Category Archives: Ancient Philosophy

Hipparchia (fl. 300 B.C.E.)

HipparchiaHipparchia is notable for being one of the few women philosophers of Ancient Greece.  Drawn to the doctrines and the self-imposed hardships of the Cynic lifestyle, Hipparchia lived in poverty with her husband, Crates the Cynic. While no existing writings are directly attributed to Hipparchia, recorded anecdotal accounts emphasize both her direct, Cynic rhetoric and her nonconformity to traditional gendered roles. Entering into marriage is a traditional social role that Cynics would normally reject; yet with her marriage to Crates, Hipparchia raised  Greek cultural expectations regarding the role of women in marriage, as well as the Cynic doctrine itself. With her husband, Hipparchia publicly embodied fundamental Cynic principles, specifically that the path toward virtue was the result of rational actors living in accordance with a natural law that eschewed conventional materialism and embraced both self-sufficiency and mental asperity.  Written accounts of Hipparchia's life reference in particular both her belief in human shamelessness or anaideia, and her rhetorical acuity at Greek symposiums traditionally attended only by men.  Along with Crates, Hipparchia is considered a direct influence on the later school of Stoicism.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Philosophy
  2. References and Further Reading

1. Life and Philosophy

Hipparchia was a Cynic philosopher from Maroneia in Thrace, who flourished around 300 B.C.E. She became famous for her marriage to Crates the Cynic, and infamous for supposedly consummating the marriage in public. Hipparchia was likely born between 340 and 330 B.C.E., and was probably in her mid-teens when she decided to adopt the Cynic mantle. She may have been introduced to philosophy by her brother, Metrocles, who was a pupil in Aristotle’s Lyceum and later began to follow Crates. Most of our knowledge about Hipparchia comes from anecdotes and sayings repeated by later authors. Diogenes Laertius reports that she wrote some letters, jokes and philosophical refutations, which are now lost (see Diogenes Laertius, Lives of Eminent Philosophers, Vol. II, tr. R. D. Hicks, Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1925, reprint 1995, VI.96-98). He adds that myriad stories were told about “the female philosopher”.

Diogenes Laertius claims that Hipparchia was so eager to marry Crates that she threatened to kill herself rather than live in any other way. (DL VI.96.7-8) Although Crates was by this time an old man, she rejected her other youthful suitors because she had fallen in love with “both the discourses and the life” of Crates, and was said to be “captured” by the logos of the Cynics. (VI.96.1 and 4-5) At the request of her parents, Crates tried to talk Hipparchia out of the marriage. (VI.96.9-10) When he failed in this task, he disrobed in front of her and said, “this is the groom, and these are his possessions; choose accordingly.” (VI.96.11-15) This tale should be taken with the proverbial grain of salt, given that Diogenes Laertius is writing centuries later, and that his account may include ‘apt’ stories that are technically false, but which arose and were transmitted because they were taken to be revealing illustrations. Given the interest and controversy generated by the female Cynic, it is easy to imagine stories of this kind being told about her. In any event, we know that Hipparchia chose to marry Crates and share his philosophical pursuits.

Hipparchia’s decision to become a Cynic was surprising, on account of both the Cynic disregard for conventional institutions and the extreme hardship of the lifestyle. Cynics attempted to live “according to nature” by rejecting artificial social conventions and refusing all luxuries, including any items not absolutely required for survival. They gave up their possessions, carrying what few they needed in a wallet. They wore only a simple mantle or cloak, and begged to obtain their basic needs. Crates’ willingness to marry was also unusual, considering that marriage is a social institution of the sort normally rejected by Cynics, and earlier Cynics like Diogenes and Antisthenes had maintained that the philosopher would never marry. A few centuries later, while arguing that marriage is generally unsuitable for the Cynic (or Stoic) philosopher, Epictetus allows for exceptions specifically because of the philosophical marriage of Hipparchia and Crates (Epictetus, Discourses, tr. C. H. Oldfather, Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1928). By marrying a Cynic and becoming one herself, Hipparchia thus performed the characteristically Cynic feat of “changing the currency,” both of her culture and the Cynic tradition itself. The Cynic motto of “change the currency” (parakrattein to nomismata), first adopted by Diogenes of Sinope, implied rejection of the prevailing social and political order in favor of an unconventional, self-sufficient life as a “citizen of the universe” (kosmopolites). (It had been said, perhaps falsely, that Diogenes or his father had been driven from Sinope when found guilty of literally defacing the coins and changing their values, but it is also likely that the counterfeiting story arose after he adopted the metaphorical motto.)

Some later authors, such as Apuleius and Augustine, report that Hipparchia and Crates consummated their marriage by having sex on a public porch. Whether the tale is accurate or not, they were known to conduct themselves in all respects according to the Cynic value of anaideia, or shamelessness. The story of Hipparchia’s Cynic marriage quickly became the premiere example of that virtue, which is based on the Cynic belief that any actions virtuous enough to be done in private are no less virtuous when performed in public. As exemplars of anaideia, Hipparchia and Crates influenced their pupil Zeno of Citium, the founder of Stoicism. His Republic advocates the equality of the sexes, co-ed public exercise and training, and a version of “free love” wherein those wishing to have sex will simply satisfy their desires wherever they happen to be at the moment, even in public. Stoic ethics were generally influenced by Cynic values, such as self-sufficiency, the importance of practice in achieving virtue, and the rejection of the conventional values attached to pleasure and pain. The Stoics also advocated living according to nature in the sense of conforming one’s own reason to the dictates of the rational natural law.

Eratosthenes reports that Hipparchia and Crates had a son named Pasicles, and Diogenes Laertius’ account of the life of Crates also refers to their son. The Cynic Letters, a collection of pseudographic letters attributed to various Cynic figures and probably written by a several different authors a few centuries after Hipparchia lived, mention that she bore and raised children according to her Cynic values. Whatever the actual details of her practices might have been, her example influenced later Cynic attitudes towards pregnancy and child-rearing. For example, one of the letters attributed to Crates suggests that Hipparchia has given birth “without trouble” because she believes that her usual “labor is the cause of not laboring” during the birth itself (33.14-15). The birth was easier because she continued to work “like an athlete” during her pregnancy (33.17), which the author notes is unusual. The letters also mention Hipparchia’s use of a tortoise shell cradle, cold water for the baby’s bath, and continued adherence to an austere diet.

Hipparchia is also famous for an exchange with Theodorus the Atheist, a Cyrenaic philosopher, who had challenged the legitimacy of her presence at a symposium. She was reported to have regularly attended such functions with Crates. According to Diogenes Laertius, Theodorus quoted a verse from Euripides’ Bacchae, asking if this is she “abandoning the warp and woof and the shuttle” (like Agave returning home from the “hunt” with the head of her son Pentheus). (VI.98.2) Hipparchia affirms that yes, it is she, but asks Theodorus whether she has had the wrong understanding of herself, if she spent her time on education rather than wasting it on the loom. (VI.98.3-6) In the ancient Greek cultural context, women of her social class typically would have been occupied with weaving and organizing the household servants, and Hipparchia’s rejection of the conventional expectations for women was quite radical.

Diogenes Laertius also reports the syllogism that Hipparchia used to put down Theodorus during the same symposium mentioned above: Premise 1: “Any action which would not be called wrong if done by Theodorus, would not be called wrong if done by Hipparchia.” Premise 2: “Now Theodorus does no wrong when he strikes himself”. Conclusion: “therefore neither does Hipparchia do wrong when she strikes Theodorus.” (VI.97.6-9) This is a classic example of the Cynic rhetorical trope of spoudogeloion: a deliberately comic syllogism which nevertheless makes a serious point. Diogenes Laertius says that since Theodorus “had no reply wherefore to meet the argument,” he “tried to strip her of her cloak. But Hipparchia showed no sign of alarm or of the perturbation natural in a woman” (VI.97), as befitted her Cynic commitment to anaideia.

2. References and Further Reading

Diogenes Laertius, Lives of Eminent Philosophers, Vol. II, tr. R. D. Hicks (Cambridge: Harvard University Press) 1925 (reprint 1995), VI.96-98.

Abraham J. Malherbe, The Cynic Epistles (Atlanta: Scholar’s Press) 1997, 78-83.

Discussions in the modern period of Hipparchia’s encounter with Theodorus are found in Bayle’s Historical and Critical Dictionary and in Menage’s History of Women Philosophers. See Pierre Bayle, Historical and Critical Dictionary: Selections, ed. Richard H. Popkin and Craig Bush (Indianapolis: Hackett) 1991, 102-103, and Gilles Menage, The History of Women Philosophers, tr. Beatrice H. Zedler (Lanham, MD: University Press of America, 1984), 103.

For further information about Cynic philosophy, see Diogenes Laertius Book VI, as well as D. R. Dudley, A History of Cynicism: From Diogenes to the Sixth Century AD (London) 1937 (reprint Ares Publishing, 1980), and R. Bracht Branham and Marie Odile Goulet-Caze, eds., The Cynics: The Cynic Movement in Antiquity and its Legacy (Berkeley: University of California Press) 2000.

Author Information

Laura Grams
University of Nebraska at Omaha
U. S. A.

The Lyceum

The Lyceum was a gymnasium near Athens and the site of a philosophical school founded by Aristotle.

Table of Contents

  1. Location, Structures, and Layout of the Lyceum
    1. Apodyterion
    2. Dromoi and Peripatoi
    3. Gymnasium Building
    4. Palaistra
    5. Sanctuaries
    6. Seats
    7. Stoas
    8. Trees and Streams
  2. History of the Use of the Lyceum
  3. References and Further Reading

1. Location, Structures, and Layout of the Lyceum

Archaeological exploration of the topography of the Lyceum has been hampered by the sprawl of buildings in modern Athens. The general location of the Lyceum outside and East of the ancient city wall is well-attested (Strabo 9.1.24, Cleidemus, FGrH 323F18, and Pausanias 1.19.3). Ancient literary and epigraphic sources and modern archaeological investigation provide an occasional glimpse into the layout and use of the Lyceum area in antiquity. While most often connected with philosophical teaching and discourse, the Lyceum was used for military exercises, meetings of the Athenian assembly, and cult practice as well as athletic training.

This multiplicity of use had a direct impact on the types of structures in the area and on the general development of the Lyceum. From the earliest times, the area was characterized by large open spaces and shady groves of trees, bounded roughly by the Ilissos river to the south and the Eridanus river and Mt. Lykabettos to the north. A series of roads led to the Lyceum from in and around the city. From the sixth century BC to the sixth century AD the area saw ever increasing numbers of buildings constructed to serve its multiple functions.

Some literary references to the Lyceum give a fuller picture. For example, in the first lines of Plato'sLysis, Socrates is walking along a road from the Academy to the Lyceum that ran under the city wall when he meets his friends Hippothales and Ktesippos near the Panops springhouse (Lysis203a-204a). This springhouse may be the one mentioned by Strabo (9.1.19), who adds that these springs were "near the Lyceum." Strabo also tells us that the Ilissus river flowed down "from above Agrai and the Lyceum" (9.1.24). In addition, Xenophon records that during a raid by the Spartans against the city from their encampment at Dekeleia to the East of the city, the Athenians came out and drew up their troops "immediately near the Lyceum gymnasium" (Hellenica 1.1.33).

Recent excavations by the Greek Archaeological Service in the area of modern Syntagma have revealed that the area immediately to the East of the ancient city wall was filled with ancient cemeteries and factories, and an immense bathing complex of the Roman period. In addition, sections of a broad, ancient road running East -West through this area have been uncovered. These finds merely add to the list of similar buildings, baths, and graves previously found in the Syntagma area.

In 1996 excavations in the area of modern Rigillis Street uncovered a structure that has been identified by the excavator as a palaistra in the Lyceum. The site continues to be excavated and studied and has not yet been fully published.

In sum, the ancient literary, epigraphic, and archaeological evidence indicates that the area known as the "Lyceum" probably covered a large area to the East of the ancient city wall, but was not immediately adjacent to the wall. It may have begun just to the West of the modern Amalias Blvd. and continued East through the modern National Gardens with the Olympieion and Ilissos river forming its southern boundaries; it may have extended northward as far as modern Kolonaki plateia. If further excavation at the site near Rigillis St. confirms the excavator's assertions that the ancient buildings there were located in the Lyceum, then we may at least have an indication of the eastern extent of the gymnasium area.

A number of different types of construction are mentioned in the literary and epigraphic sources as being in the Lyceum: an apodyterion (dressing room), dromoi (roads or running tracks) andperipatoi (walks), a gymnasium building, and a palaistra (wrestling school), cult sanctuaries, seating areas, and stoas. Irrigation channels were constructed to keep the area green and wooded.

a. Apodyterion

Literally an "an undressing room." The building in which the scene of Plato's Euthydemus (272e-273b) begins. This structure may be either a part of the gymnasium building or the palaistra, or it may have stood independently to serve the covered dromos (racetrack) mentioned in the passage.

b. Dromoi and Peripatoi

Dromoi and Peripatoi: The sources refer to two different types of dromoi: 1) the main East-West road leading up to the city wall through the Lyceum (Xenophon, Hellenica 2.4.27, Xenophon, The Cavalry Commander 3.6, Callimachus, fr. 261 Pfeiffer), and 2) the running tracks (Plato,Euthydemus 272e-273b). Stretches of the main road, which ran through modern Syntagma square and past the modern Parliament building parallel to the present Vasilis Sophias Blvd. have been uncovered and should be the main dromos to which our sources refer. Excavation has not produced any evidence for the location of the dromoi for foot or horse races.

c. Gymnasium Building

An honorary decree for the Athenian statesman Lycurgus (IG II2 457) states that this building was repaired in the 330s BC. The original structure may have been built either by Pericles (Philochoros,FGrH 328F37) in the fifth century BC or Pisistratus (Theopompus, FGrH 115F136) in the sixth century BC. It is the only gymnasium building that is attested in Athens during the Classical period.

d. Palaistra

The scene of Plato's Euthydemus, which was also perhaps repaired in the 330s BC by Lycurgus ([Plutarch], Lives of the Orators 841d).

e. Sanctuaries

The Lyceum itself was a sanctuary to Apollo, but it also contained a shrine to the Muses that housed many dedications and a portrait bust of Aristotle (Diogenes Laertius 5.51, also cf. IG II2 2613). There was also a cult of Hermes on the Lyceum grounds (IG II2 1357b4).

f. Seats

There were seats for the athlothetai (judges in an athletic contest) somewhere in the Lyceum grounds (Aischin. Soc. fr. 2.2 Dittmar=Demetr. Elocut. 205).

g. Stoas

A small stoa stood near the sanctuary to the Muses, and another stoa had maps of the earth displayed on tablets on the walls (Diogenes Laertius 5.51-52; Lucian, Anachar. 33).

h. Trees and Streams

Parts of the Lyceum were apparently wooded, and channels were dug from the Ilissus and Eridanus rivers to keep the area green. Theophrastus notes one enormous plane tree in particular that "sent out roots a distance of 33 cubits" (Theophrastus, On Plants 1.7.1). The woods were said to have been chopped down during the siege by Sulla in 86 BC (Plutarch, Sulla 12.3).

2. History of the Use of the Lyceum

The Lyceum, like the other famous Athenian gymnasia (the Academy and Cynosarges) was more than a space for physical exercise and philosophical discussion, reflection, and study. It contained cults of Hermes, the Muses, and Apollo, to whom the area was dedicated and belonged. It was also used for military exercises, the marshaling of troops, and for military displays. The Lyceum thus encompassed a fairly large area, including large open spaces, buildings, and cult sites.

The Lyceum was named after Apollo Lyceus, Apollo "the wolf-god." From at least the sixth-century BC the Lyceum is said to have been the place where the polemarch (head of the army) had his office (Hesychius, "Epilykeion" and Suda, "ArchÙn"). The area was also used for military exercises (Suda, "Lykeion") and for the marshaling of troops before departing on campaign (Aristophanes, Peace 351-357); it was also the site of cavalry displays (Xenophon, The Cavalry Commander 3.1). The Lyceum was also the place for meetings of the Athenian assembly before the establishment of a permanent meeting area on the Pnyx hill during the fifth century BC (IG I3 105).

The Lyceum was a place of philosophical discussion and debate well before Aristotle founded his school there in 335 BC. Socrates (Euthydemus 271a, Euthyphro 2a, Symposium 223d), Prodicus of Chios ([Plato], Eryxias 397c-d), and Protagoras (Diogenes Laertius 9.54) all apparently frequented the Lyceum to debate, discuss, and teach during the last third of the fifth-century BC. Plato's great rival Isocrates taught rhetoric in the Lyceum during the first half of the fourth century BC, as did other sophists and philosophers. Rhapsodes were said to teach there as well (Alexis, PCG fr. 25, Antiphanes, PCG fr. 120, and Isocrates, Panathenaecus 33.5).

Upon his return to Athens in 335 BC, Aristotle rented some buildings in the Lyceum and established a school there. For nearly the remainder of his life, it was here that Aristotle lectured, wrote most of his philosophical treatises and dialogues, and systematically collected books for the first library in European history. After Aristotle's death in 322 BC the headship of the school passed to Theophrastus, who continued his master's program of research and teaching in the Lyceum. Theophrastus also purchased buildings and land that he bequeathed to the school in his will. However, the quality of the school's library may have declined after Theophrastus' death in 287 BC with the apparent loss of many of Aristotle's works to Neleus of Scepsis (Strabo 13.1.54).

From the time of Aristotle until 86 BC there was a continuous succession of philosophers in charge of the school in the Lyceum. The common name for the school, Peripatetic, was derived either from the peripatos in the Lyceum grounds or from Aristotle's habit of lecturing while walking. The school was a part of the military/educational institution for the city's elite, the ephebeia. This program of study and military service provided eighteen- to twenty-year-old Athenian males with a curriculum of philosophy, knowledge of the ancestral cults, and instruction in the art of war. The Lyceum's fame-and the fame of other schools in Athens-attracted increasing numbers of philosophers and students from all over the Mediterranean world.

The brutal sack of Athens by the Roman general Sulla in 86 BC destroyed much of the Lyceum and disrupted the life of the school considerably. The school may have been refounded later in the first century BC by Andronicus of Rhodes, but this is uncertain. By the second century AD, the Lyceum was again a flourishing center of philosophical activity. The Roman emperor Marcus Aurelius appointed teachers to all the main philosophical schools in Athens, including the Lyceum. The utter destruction of Athens in AD 267 probably ended this renaissance of scholarly activity. The work of Peripatetic philosophers continued elsewhere, but it is unclear whether they returned to the Lyceum. Nothing certain is known about the Lyceum during the remainder of the third through early sixth centuries AD. Any remaining philosophical activity would certainly have ended in AD 529, when the emperor Justinian closed all the philosophical schools in Athens.

3. References and Further Reading

  • J.P. Lynch, Aristotle's School: A Study of a Greek Educational Institution. Berkeley 1972.
  • C.E. Ritchie, "The Lyceum, the Garden of Theophrastos and the Garden of the Muses. A Topographical Reevaluation"
  • J. Travlos, Pictorial Dictionary of Ancient Athens. Athens 1971.
  • Wycherley, R.E. The Stones of Athens. Princeton 1978.

Author Information

William Morison
Department of History

Lucretius (c. 99—c. 55 B.C.E.)

LucretiusLucretius (Titus Lucretius Carus) was a Roman poet and the author of the philosophical epic De Rerum Natura (On the Nature of the Universe), a comprehensive exposition of the Epicurean world-view. Very little is known of the poet’s life, though a sense of his character and personality emerges vividly from his poem. The stress and tumult of his times stands in the background of his work and partly explains his personal attraction and commitment to Epicureanism, with its elevation of intellectual pleasure and tranquility of mind and its dim view of the world of social strife and political violence. His epic is presented in six books and undertakes a full and completely naturalistic explanation of the physical origin, structure, and destiny of the universe. Included in this presentation are theories of the atomic structure of matter and the emergence and evolution of life forms – ideas that would eventually form a crucial foundation and background for the development of western science. In addition to his literary and scientific influence, Lucretius has been a major source of inspiration for a wide range of modern philosophers, including Gassendi, Bergson, Spencer, Whitehead, and Teilhard de Chardin.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
    1. Italy during the First Century BCE
    2. Lucretius' Personality and Outlook
  2. Philosophy
    1. Epicurus
    2. Epicureanism
      1. Physics
      2. Canonic
      3. Ethics
    3. The Design of the Poem
    4. Lucretius as a Philosopher
    5. Influence and Legacy
    6. Conclusion
  3. References and Further Reading
    1. Texts
    2. English Translations
    3. Critical and Scholarly Studies

1. Life

Of Lucretius' life remarkably little is known: he was an accomplished poet; he lived during the first century BC; he was devoted to the teachings of Epicurus; and he apparently died before his magnum opus, De Rerum Natura, was completed. Almost everything else we know (or think we know) about this elusive figure is a matter of conjecture, rumor, legend, or gossip.

Some scholars have imagined that this lack of information is the result of a sinister plot - a conspiracy of silence supposedly conducted by pious Roman and early Christian writers bent on suppressing the poet's anti-religious sentiments and materialist blasphemies. Yet perhaps more vexing for our understanding of Lucretius than any conspiracy of silence has been the single lurid item about his death that appears in a fourth century chronicle history by St. Jerome:


[sic] BC. . . The poet Titus Lucretius is born. He was later driven mad by a love philtre and, having composed between bouts of insanity several books (which Cicero afterwards corrected), committed suicide at the age of 44.

Certainly the possibility that Lucretius (whose blistering, two hundred line denunciation of sexual love comprises one of the memorable highlights of the poem) may himself have fallen victim to a love potion is a superb irony. Unfortunately, there is not a shred of evidence to support the claim. Nor is it highly likely that Cicero (a skeptical-minded thinker with sympathies toward Stoicism) would have assisted to any large degree in the publication of an epic celebrating the Epicurean creed. As for the suggestion that Lucretius produced De Rerum Natura in lucid periods between intervals of raging insanity, the poem itself stands as a strong argument to the contrary. At the very least it must be considered improbable that a work of such scope and complexity, of such intellectual depth and sustained reasoning power, could have been the product of fitful composition and a diseased mind.

Fortunately, even if we dismiss Jerome's account as little more than an edifying fable and resign ourselves to the absence of even a scrap of reliable biographical information on Lucretius, there is still one source we can turn to for valuable insights into the poet's character, personality, and habits of mind, and that is De Rerum Natura itself. For although the poem tells us almost nothing about the day to day affairs of Lucretius the man, it nevertheless furnishes a large and revealing portrait of Lucretius the poet, philosopher, social commentator, critic of religion, and observer of the world.

Indeed one does not have to read very far into the poem to discover that not only is Lucretius a serious student of philosophy and science, but that above all he is a great poet of nature. He reveals himself as a lover of woods, fields, streams, and open spaces, acutely sensitive to the beauties of landscape and the march of seasons. He proves a keen observer of plants and animals and at least as knowledgeable and interested in crops, weather, soil, and horticulture as in the existence of gods or the motion of atoms. The preponderance of natural descriptions and images in the poem has led some readers to suppose that the author must have led some form of rural existence, perhaps as the owner of a country estate. True or not, it is clearly not the city, with its hurly-burly of commerce, money grubbing, social climbing, and political strife, but the quiet countryside with its contemplative retreats, solitude, and simple pleasures that inspires his poetry and (as was the case with his master Epicurus in his garden at Athens) his philosophical reveries.

It is generally assumed that the poet, as his name implies, was a member of the aristocratic clan of the Lucretii. On the other hand, it is also possible that he was a former slave and freedman of that same noble family. Support for the idea of his nobility comes in part from his suave command of learning and the polished mastery of his style, but mostly from the easy and natural way (friend to friend, rather than subordinate to superior) in which he addresses Memmius, his literary patron and the addressee of the poem.

Gaius Memmius was a Roman patrician who was at one time married to Sulla's daughter, Fausta. In 54 BC (one year after Lucretius' death), he stood for consul, but was defeated owing to an electoral violation, which he himself revealed but was afterwards condemned for. In 52 BC he went into exile at Athens, and it is unknown whether he ever returned to Rome. Lucretius dedicated his poem to him, and throughout the epic the poet is at pains to remind Memmius of the sweet rewards of the Epicurean lifestyle and the bitter tribulations of public life. No doubt it would have distressed the poet deeply to know that his chief literary sponsor, instead of following the lofty path to Epicurean tranquilitas, ended his career with a vain descent into the tarnishing world of power politics and personal ambition.

Literary tradition has supplied Lucretius with a wife, Lucilla. However, except for a line or two in the poem suggesting the author's personal familiarity with marital discord and the bedroom practices of "our Roman wives" (4. 1277), there is no evidence that he himself was ever married.

a. Italy during the First Century BCE

For the most part, the forty-four years of Lucretius' lifetime was a period of nearly non-stop violence: a time of civil wars, grueling overseas campaigns, political assassinations, massacres, revolts, conspiracies, mass executions, and social and economic chaos. Even a brief chronology of the times paints a grim picture of devastation, with each decade bearing witness to some new disturbance or uprising:

100 BC: riots erupt in the streets of Rome; two public officials, the tribune L. Appuleius Saturninus and praetor C. Servilius Glaucia, are murdered. 91 BC: the so-called Social War (between Rome and her Italian allies) breaks out. No sooner is this bitter struggle ended (88 BC) than Lucius Cornelius Sulla, a ruthless politician and renegade army commander, marches on Rome, and an even more convulsive and bloody Civil War begins. 82 BC: Sulla becomes dictator. His infamous proscription results in the arrest and execution of more than 4000 leading citizens, including 40 senators. 71 BC: Spartacus' massive slave revolt (involving an army of 90,000 former slaves and outlaws) is finally put down by Cassius and Pompey. More than 6000 of the captured rebels are crucified and their bodies left for display along the Appian Way. 62 BC: Defeat and death of Catiline. By this point in his career this former lieutenant of Sulla had become a living plague upon Roman politics and a virtual byword for scandal, intrigue, conspiracy, demagoguery, and vain ambition.Such was Rome from the rise of Sulla to the fall of Catiline, a period of seemingly endless bloodshed and civil unrest. With such a background, it is little wonder that the precepts of Epicurus - with their emphasis on contemplative pursuits and quiet pleasures and severe strictures against ambition, fame, and the world of politics - struck a responsive chord in the heart of a young Roman poet. To a sensitive intellectual like Lucretius, the teachings of Epicurus must have had the force of a philosophical revelation. In this respect, it is noteworthy (and ironic) that throughout De Rerum Natura whenever the poet writes about Epicurus he praises him not simply as a great teacher and brilliant philosopher, but virtually as a kind of oracle and even a god. Meanwhile, he seems to have viewed his own role as that of an Epicurean evangelist: he is a poetic apostle dedicated to spreading the master's gospel of liberation from the bondage of superstition and error, of inner peace attained through the study of philosophy and the enjoyment of modest pleasures.

b. Lucretius' Personality and Outlook

Unlike his hero Epicurus, who had a reputation for being gentle and self-effacing, Lucretius' excitable personality springs vividly from his pages. Though naturally passionate and intellectually contentious, he also reveals himself as reflective and prone to melancholy. Like his master, he detests war, strife, and social tumult and favors a life quietly devoted to sweet friendship (suavis amicitia) and intellectual pleasures.

At the beginning of Book 2 of his poem, the poet compares the prospect of a person armed with the insights of Epicurus to that of a secure spectator looking down upon a scene of strife:

Pleasant it is, when over the great sea the winds shake the waters,
To gaze down from shore on the trials of others;
Not because seeing other people struggle is sweet to us,
But because the fact that we ourselves are free from such ills strikes us as pleasant.
Pleasant it is also to behold great armies battling on a plain,
When we ourselves have no part in their peril.
But nothing is sweeter than to occupy a lofty sanctuary of the mind,
Well fortified with the teachings of the wise,
Where we may look down on others as they stumble along,
Vainly searching for the true path of life. . . . (2. 1-10)

This idea of philosophy as a private citadel or quiet refuge in a world of anxiety and turmoil, or of some form of contemplation as the true path to enlightenment, has been a recurrent theme in world literature from the Buddha to Boethius, from Socrates to Schopenhauer. The idea is a central component of Epicurean doctrine and a favorite theme and image of Lucretius, whose characteristic vantage point throughout the poem is that of a critical observer above the fray. As narrator, he stands aloof, a scornful yet at the same time sympathetic witness to mankind's dark strivings and tribulations:

Lo, see them: contending with their wits, fighting for precedence,
Struggling night and day with unending effort,Climbing, clawing their way up the pinnacles of wealth and power.
O miserable minds of men! O blind hearts!
In what darkness, among how many perils,
You pass your short lives! Do you not see
That our nature requires only this:
A body free from pain, and a mind, released from worry and fear,
Free to enjoy feelings of delight? (2. 11-19.)

Like his master, Lucretius obviously feels that the true purpose of moral philosophy is not merely to diagnose human miseries; but to heal them.

2. Philosophy

a. Epicurus

From the very start of the poem, and especially in the opening lines of Book 3 (a ringing tribute to Epicurus), Lucretius makes it clear that his main purpose is not so much to display his own talents as to render accurately in a suitably sublime style the glorious philosophy of his master:

O you who out of the vast darkness were the first to raise
A shining light, illuminating the blessings of life,
O glory of the Grecian race, it is you I follow,
Tracing in your clearly marked footprints my own firm steps,
Not as a contending rival, but out of love, for I yearn to imitate you.
For why should the swallow vie with the swan?
Why should a young kid on spindly limbs
Dare to match strides with a mighty steed? (3. 1-8.)

The poetry, Lucretius keeps reminding his readers, is secondary, a sugar coating to sweeten Epicurus' healing medicine. The Epicurean system is what is important, and the poet pledges all his skill to presenting it as clearly, as faithfully, and as persuasively as possible. In his view nothing less than universal enlightenment and the liberation of mankind is at stake.

Epicurus was born at Samos, an Athenian colony, in 341 BC. Reduced to its simplest level, the goal of his teaching was to free humanity from needless cares and anxieties (especially the fear of death) . By furnishing a complete explanation of the origin and structure of the universe, he sought to open men's eyes to a true understanding of their condition and liberate them from ignorant fears and superstitions. Though by all accounts he was a voluminous writer, only a tiny fraction of his original output has survived, with the result that Lucretius' poem has served as one of the primary vehicles for conveying his thought.

b. Epicureanism

The Epicurean system consists of three linked components: Physics, Ethics, and Canonic. These three elements are designed to be interdependent, each one supposedly uniting with and reinforcing the other two. (To cite just one example, Epicurus' physics supposedly validates both the existence of free will and the fact that the soul disintegrates with the body, ideas that are crucial to Epicurean ethics. The canonic claims to validate the authority and reliability of sensation, which in turn serves as a basis for Epicurean physical theories and ethical views relating to pleasure and pain.) In actual fact, however, the three components are quite separable, and it is certainly possible, for example, to accept Epicurus' ethical doctrines while entirely denying his canonic teachings and physics.

i. Physics

One of the great achievements of the scientific imagination, the Epicurean cosmos is based on three fundamental principles: materialism, mechanism, and atomism. According to Epicurus the universe covers an infinitude of space and consists entirely of matter and void. For the most part the philosopher upholds Democritus' theory that all matter is composed of imperishable atoms, tiny indivisible particles that can neither be created or destroyed. He also shares Democritus' view that the atoms are infinite in number and homogenous in substance, while differing in shape and size. However, whereas Democritus held that the number of atomic sizes and shapes is infinite, Epicurus argued that their number, while large, is nevertheless finite. (As Lucretius notes, if atoms could be any size, some would be visible, and possibly even immense.) As for atomic motion, Democritus had claimed that the atoms move in straight lines in all directions and always in accordance with the iron laws of "necessity" (anangke). Epicurus, on the other hand, contends that their natural motion is to travel straight downwards at a uniform high velocity. At random and unpredictable moments, moreover, they deviate ever so slightly from their regular course, their resulting collisions thus occurring not by strict necessity but always with some element of chance. This theory of atomic "swerve" or clinamen is a crucial feature of the Epicurean world-view, providing (so Lucretius and other adherents believed) a firm physical foundation supporting the existence of free will.

Armed with these basic principles, Epicurus is able to explain the universe as an ongoing cosmic event - a never-ending binding and unbinding of atoms resulting in the gradual emergence of entire new worlds and the gradual disintegration of old ones. Our world, our bodies, our minds are but atoms in motion. They did not occur because of some purpose or final cause. Nor were they created by some god for our special use and benefit. They simply happened, more or less randomly and entirely naturally, through the effective operation of immutable and eternal physical laws.

Here it should be noted that Epicurus is a materialist, not an atheist. Although he argues that not only our earth and all its life forms, but also all human civilizations and arts came into being and evolved without any aid or sponsorship from the gods, he does not deny their existence. He merely denies that they have any knowledge of or interest in human affairs. They live on immune to destruction in their perfectly compounded material bodies in the serene and cloudless spaces between the worlds (intermundia), perfectly oblivious of human anxieties and cares. Lucretius imagines that Epicurus rivaled them in their divine tranquility.

ii. Canonic

The so-called canonic teachings of Epicurus (from the Greek kanon, "rule") include his epistemological theories and especially his theories of sensation and perception. In certain respects, these theories represent Epicurus' thought at its most original and prescient - and in one or two instances at its most fanciful and absurd.

The central principle of the canonic is that our sense data provide a true and accurate picture of external reality. Sensation is the ultimate source and criterion of truth, and its testimony is incontrovertible. Epicurus considered the reliability of the senses a bulwark of his philosophy, and Lucretius refers to trust in sensation as a "holdfast," describing it as the only thing preventing our slide into the abyss of skepticism (4. 502-512).

But if our sensory input is always true and dependable, how are we to account for hallucinations, fantasies, dreams, delusions, and other forms of perceptual error? According to Epicurus, such errors are always due to some higher mental process. They arise, for example, when we apply judgment or reasoning or some confused product of memory to the actual data presented to us by sensation. As Lucretius remarks, we deceive ourselves because we tend to "see some things with our mind that have not been seen by the senses":

For nothing is harder than to distinguish the real things of sense
From those doubtful versions of them that the mind readily supplies. (4. 466-468.)

Epicurus' theory of sensory perception is consistent with and follows from his materialism and atomism. Like Democritus, he postulates that external objects send off emanations or "idols" (eidola) of themselves that travel through the air and impinge upon our senses. In effect, these subtle atomic images or films imprint themselves on the senses, leaving behind trace versions of the external world (auditory and olfactory as well as visual) that can be apprehended and stored in memory. Once again, perceptual errors can occur in this process, but not because of any inherent problem with sensation itself. Instead, mistakes arise due either to the contamination of the "idols" by other atoms or because of the "false opinions" that we ourselves, through defects in our higher mental operations, introduce.

In short, unless it is distorted by some form of external "noise" or by some processing error attributable to reason, all information conveyed through the senses is true. This is Epicurus' core canonic teaching. Unfortunately, this belief in the infallibility of sense perception and the unreliability of logic and reason led him and his followers (including Lucretius) into a number of strange conclusions - such as the absurd claim that the sun, moon, and stars are exactly the size and shape that they appear to be to our naked eye. Thus (as strict Epicurean doctrine would have it) the moon truly is a small, silver disc, the sun is a slightly larger golden fire, and the stars are but tiny points of light.

iii. Ethics

Epicurus' ethics represents the true goal and raison d’etre of his philosophical mission, the capstone atop the impressive (though hardly flawless) pillars of his physics and epistemology. Like Socrates, he considered moral questions (What is virtue? What is happiness?) rather than cosmological speculations to be the ultimate concerns of philosophical inquiry.

As mentioned earlier, it is possible to accept one component of the Epicurean system without necessarily subscribing to the others. But from Epicurus' (and Lucretius’) point of view, it is the ethical component that is of vital importance.

As many commentators have noted, the term "Epicure" (in the sense of a self-indulgent bon vivant or luxurious pleasure-seeker) is entirely out of place when applied to Epicureanism in general and to its founder in particular. By all accounts, Epicurus' own living habits were virtually Spartan, and it is said that he attracted many of his disciples more by his solid character and agreeable temper than by his philosophical arguments. His moral philosophy is a form of hedonism, meaning that it is a system based on the pursuit of pleasure (Gr. 'ēdonewhich it identifies as the greatest good. But Epicurean hedonism is hardly synonymous with sensual extravagance; nor is it a matter (in St. Paul's disparaging terms) of "let us eat and drink; for tomorrow we die." It is instead a system that requires severe self-denial and moral discipline. For Epicurus places a much greater emphasis on the avoidance of pain than on the pursuit of pleasure, and he favors intellectual pleasures (which are long-lasting and never cloying) over physical ones (which are short-lived and lead to excess). As for self-indulgence, he argued that it is better to abstain from coarse or trivial pleasures if they prevent our enjoyment of richer, more satisfying ones.

In Epicurean ethics physical pain is the great enemy of happiness and is to be avoided in almost all cases. Mental anguish is even more threatening and potentially debilitating. It follows that the fear of death - and especially the superstitious belief in an after-life of eternal torment - can be particularly devastating source of anxiety and take a terrible toll on humanity, which is why Epicurus sets out so determinedly to crush it.

c. The Design of the Poem

De Rerum Natura is an epic in six books and is expertly organized to provide both expository clarity as well as powerful narrative and lyric effects. In one respect, the poem represents the unfolding of a complex philosophical argument, and in many places the poet is challenged to explain abstract and often extremely prosaic technical material in a lucid and lively way. (At times during the poem he complains about the relative poverty of Latin as a philosophical medium compared to the technical richness of Greek.) At the same time, he must be careful not to overwhelm or upstage his philosophical presentation with a surplus of brilliant literary devices and gaudy stylistic displays. The basic organization is as follows:

Book 1: The poem begins with a justly famous invocation to Venus (the poet's symbol for the forces of cohesion, integration, and creative energy in the universe). Presented as a kind of life principle, the Lucretian Venus is associated with the figure of Love (Gr. philia, the unifying or binding force in the philosophy of Empedocles, and also identified with her mythical role as Venus Genetrix, the patron goddess and mother of the Roman people. In the remainder of the book the poet begins the work of explaining the Epicurean system and refuting the systems of other philosophers. He starts by setting forth the major principles of Epicurean physics and cosmology, including atomism, the infinity of the universe, and the existence of matter and void.

Book 2. This book begins with a lyric passage celebrating the "serene sanctuaries" of philosophy and lamenting the condition of those poor human beings who struggle vainly outside its protective walls. The poet explains atomic motion and shapes and argues that the atoms do not have secondary qualities (color, smell, heat, moisture, etc.).

Book 3. After a glowing opening apostrophe to Epicurus ("O glory of the Greeks!"), the poet proceeds with an extended explanation and proof of the materiality - and mortality – of the mind and soul. This explanation culminates in the climactic declaration, "Nil igitur mors est ad nos. . ." ("Therefore death is nothing to us."), a stark, simple statement which effectively epitomizes the main message and central doctrine of Epicureanism.

Book 4. Following introductory verses on the art of didactic poetry, this book begins with a full account of Epicurus' theory of vision and sensation. It concludes with one of Lucretius' greatest passages of verse, his famous (and caustic) analysis of the biology and psychology of sexual love.

Book 5. Lucretius begins this book with another tribute to the genius of Epicurus, whose heroic intellectual achievements, it is argued, exceed even the twelve labors of Hercules. The remainder of the book is devoted to a full account of Epicurean cosmology and sociology, with the poet explaining the stages of life on earth and the origin and development of civilization. This book includes the remarkable passage (837-886) in which the poet offers his own evolutionary hypothesis on the proliferation and extinction of life forms.

Book 6. Though partly unfinished, this book contains some of Lucretius' greatest poetry, with effective technical explanations of meteorological and geologic phenomena and vivid descriptions of thunderstorms, lightning, and volcanic eruptions. The poem closes with a horrifying account of the great plague of Athens (430 BC), a grim reminder of universal mortality.

d. Lucretius as a Philosopher

Critics universally recognize Lucretius as a major poet and the author of one of the great classics of world literature. But in part because of his accepted role as a spokesperson for Epicureanism rather than an originator, it has been more difficult to assess his merit as a philosopher.

In this respect, it is noteworthy that at least two important philosophers have voiced strong support for Lucretius' status as a philosophical innovator and original thinker. In 1884, while still a young faculty member at the Blaise Pascal Lycee in Paris, the French philosopher Henri Bergson (1859-1941) published an edition of De Rerum Natura with notes, commentary, and an accompanying critical essay. Throughout this work, Bergson commends Lucretius not only as a poet of genius, but also as an inspired and "singularly original" thinker. In particular, he points out that in his view the poet's instinctive grasp of the physical operations of nature and his comprehensive, truly scientific world-view exceed anything found in the theories of Democritus and Epicurus.

The Spanish poet and Harvard philosopher George Santayana (1863-1952) held a similarly high opinion of Lucretius' power as a scientific thinker. Democritus and Epicurus, he argues, are mere sketch artists who offer no more than bare hints and vague outlines of a thoroughly imagined and truly scientifically conceived universe. It thus remained for the deeper, more visionary poet not just to flesh out their rough drafts in fine words, but in essence to actually create and give body to the entire Epicurean system. In Santayana's view, Epicurus was but a supplier of half-baked ideas; it was Lucretius who was the true creator of scientific materialism and the real founder of Epicureanism.

Hyperbole aside, what both Bergson and Santayana are pointing to is the frequently underrated and misunderstood role of imagination in the production of almost all major systems of philosophy. Great philosophers from Plato and Aristotle to Kant and Nietzsche (and Bergson himself) have never been simply logic mills or thinking machines, but bold thinkers with an imaginative "feel" for abstract reality. In this respect, even if we dismiss the assessments of Bergson and Santayana as extravagant, we can still accept Lucretius as a bona fide philosopher and not just as a poetical embellisher and interpreter.

Every philosopher has strengths and weaknesses; those of Lucretius are conspicuous. In addition to his powerful imagination, his main strength (not surprisingly) is his verbal skill and force of expression. He is one of the most quotable of philosophers, with a flair for striking images and tightly packed statements. A few samples:

On superstition:

"So powerful is religion at persuading to evil." 1. 101.

On luxuries:

"Hot fevers do not depart your body more quickly
If you toss about on pictured tapestries or rich purple coverlets
Than if you lie sick under a poor man's blanket." 2. 34-36.

On life without philosophy:

"All life is a struggle in the dark." 2. 54.
"After a while the life of a fool is hell on earth." 3. 1023.

On new truths:

"No fact is so obvious that it does not at first produce wonder,
Nor so wonderful that it does not eventually yield to belief." 2. 1026-27.

On reason:

"Such is the power of reason to overcome inborn vices
That nothing prevents our living a life worthy of gods." 3. 321-22.

On the language of love:

"We say a foul, dirty woman is 'sweetly disordered,'
If she is green-eyed, we call her 'my little Pallas';
If she's flighty and tightly strung, she’s 'a gazelle’;
A squat, dumpy dwarf is 'a little sprite,'
While a hulking giantess is 'divinely statuesque.'
If she stutters or lisps, she speaks 'musically.'
If she's dumb, she’s 'modest’; and if she’s hot-tempered
And a chatterbox, she's 'a ball of fire.’
When she's too skinny to live, she’s 'svelte,’
And she's 'delicate’ when she’s dying of consumption. . .
It would be wearisome to run through the whole list." 4. 1159-1171.

Of all Lucretius' intellectual strengths, perhaps none is more characteristic or stands out more impressively than his hard, clear commitment to naturalism. Throughout the poem he consistently attacks supernatural explanations of phenomena and resists the temptation to give in to some form of natural religion or "scientific" supernaturalism. The world, he argues, was not created by divine intelligence, nor is it imbued with any form of mind or purpose. Instead, it must be understood as an entirely natural phenomenon, the outcome of a random (though statistically inevitable and lawful) process. In short, whatever happens in the universe is not the product of design, but part of an ongoing sequence of purely physical events.

Lucretius' principal philosophical shortcoming is that not only will he occasionally follow Epicurean doctrine to the point of absurdity (e.g., the supposedly tiny size of the sun and moon) but he will also introduce logical fallacies or scientific errors of his own (such as his claim that the atoms travel faster than light - 2. 144ff.). As Bergson points out, these howlers can usually be attributed to the defective method of ancient science, which, because it did not require that hypotheses be confirmed by experimentation, allowed even the wildest conjectures to pass as plausible truths. One further problem is that, for all his reliance on naturalistic explanations and his attempted reduction of metaphysics to physics, Lucretius at times seems to back away, if only ever so slightly, from a purely materialist world view. Indeed in his effusive descriptions of the creative power of nature, effectively symbolized by the figure of Venus, he seems almost (like Bergson) to postulate an immaterial life-force surging through the universe and operating above or beyond raw nature. To read this romantic streak into him is clearly a mistake. Lucretius remains a thorough-going naturalist. Yet when his verse is in high gear, one almost gets the impression that somewhere inside this staunchly scientific, fiercely anti-religious poet there is a romantic nature-worshipper screaming to get out.

e. Influence and Legacy

Lucretius' literary influence has been long-lasting and widespread, especially among poets with epic ambitions or cosmological interests, from Virgil and Milton to Whitman and Wordsworth. Not surprisingly, as one of the main proponents and principal sources of Epicurean thought, his philosophical influence has also been considerable. The extent of his communication with and influence on his contemporaries, including other Epicurean writers, is not known. What is known is that by the end of the first century A.D. De Rerum Natura was hardly read and its author had already begun a long, slow descent into philosophical oblivion. It was not until the Renaissance, with the recovery of lost Lucretian manuscripts, that a true revival of the poet became possible.

It is probably an exaggeration to say that the restoration and study of Lucretius' poem was crucial to the rise of Renaissance "new philosophy" and the birth of modern science. On the other hand, one must not ignore its importance as a spur to innovative sixteenth- and seventeenth-century scientific thought and cosmological speculation. Greek atomism and Lucretius' account of the universe as an infinite, lawfully integrated whole provided an important background stimulus not only for Newtonian science, but also (if only in a negative or contrary way) for Spinoza's pantheism and Leibniz’s monadology.

Lucretius' influence on early modern thought is most directly visible in the work of the French scientist and neo-Epicurean philosopher Pierre Gassendi (1592-1655). In 1649 Gassendi published his Syntagma Philosophiae Epicuri, a theoretical refinement and elaboration of Epicurean science. A Catholic priest with a remarkably independent mind, Gassendi seemingly had no problem reconciling his personal philosophical commitment to atomism and materialism with his Christian beliefs in the immortality of the soul and the doctrine of divine providence.

Every modern reader of De Rerum Natura has been struck by the extent to which Lucretius seems to have anticipated modern evolutionary theories in the fields of geology, biology, and sociology. However, to acknowledge this connection is not to say that the poet deserves accredited status as some kind of scientific "evolutionist" or pre-Darwinian precursor. It is merely to point out that, however we choose to define and evaluate its influence, De Rerum Natura was from the 17th century onward a massive cultural presence and hence a ready source of evolutionary ideas. The poem formed part of the cultural heritage and intellectual background of virtually every evolutionary theorist in Europe from Lamarck to Herbert Spencer (whose hedonistic ethics also owed a debt to the poet) - including (though he claimed never to have read Lucretius' epic) Darwin himself.

Bergson's early study of Lucretius obviously played an important role in the foundation and development of his own philosophy. In 1907 Bergson published Creative Evolution, outlining his bold, new vitalistic theory of evolution, in opposition to both the earlier vitalism of Lamarck and the naturalism of Darwin, and Spencer. It is hard not to see in the French philosophers' concept of the élan vital a powerful life force akin to and strongly influenced by the immortal Venus of his great Latin predecessor. Bergson's evolutionary philosophy influenced the later "process" philosophy of Alfred North Whitehead (1861-1947) and the teleological scientific theories of Pierre Teilhard de Chardin (1881-1955), with the interesting result that it is possible to trace out a fairly direct, if unlikely, line of descent from Greek atomism through the pagan anti-spiritualist Lucretius to the Catholic naturalist Gassendi and then on, via the Jewish-Catholic Bergson, to the highly abstract theism of Whitehead and the "spiritualized" evolutionism of Father Teilhard. That Lucretius' ideas wound up two thousand years after his death influencing those of a godly British mathematical theorist and a highly original and even eccentric French scientist-priest is remarkable testimony to their durability, adaptability, and persuasive power.

f. Conclusion

In conclusion, it seems fair to say that, far from being a mere conduit for earlier Greek thought, the poet Titus Lucretius Carus was a bold innovator and original thinker who fully deserves the appellation of philosopher. While his literary fame clearly (and properly) comes first, and although his philosophical reputation is based largely (and again properly) on his role as one of the principle sources and prime exponents of Epicureanism, his own ideas, especially his evolutionary theories and his entirely naturalistic explanation of all universal phenomena, have exerted a long and important influence on western science and philosophy and should not be underestimated.

3. References and Further Reading

The most authoritative manuscripts of De Rerum Natura are the so-called O and Q codices in Leiden. Both date from the 9th century. Recently, however, scholars have deciphered a much older and previously illegible manuscript, consisting of papyri discovered in Herculaneum and possibly dating from as early as the first century AD. All other Lucretian manuscripts date from the 15th and 16th century and are based on the one (no longer extant) discovered in a monastery by the Italian humanist Poggio Bracciolini in 1417.

a. Texts

  • Lucretius: On the Nature of Things. W.H.D. Rouse, trans. Revised and edited by Martin F. Smith. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1992.
  • Bailey, C. ed. De Rerum Natura. 3 volumes with commentary. Oxford, 1947.

b. English Translations

  • Munro, H.A.J. (prose). Cambridge, 1864.Latham, R.E. (prose). Harmondsworth, UK: Penguin, 1951.
  • Humphries, Rolphe. (verse). Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1968.
  • Copley, Frank O. (verse). New York: Norton, 1977.

c. Critical and Scholarly Studies

  • Bergson, Henri. Philosophy of Poetry: The Genius of Lucretius. Wade Baskin, trans. New York: Philosophical Library, 1959.
  • Clay, D. Lucretius and Epicurus. Ithaca, NY, 1983.
  • Jones, H. The Epicurean Tradition. London: 1989.
  • Kenney, E. J. Lucretius. Oxford, 1977.
  • Santayana, George. Three Philosophical Poets. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Sikes, E.E. Lucretius: Poet and Philosopher. Cambridge, 1936.

Author Information

David Simpson
DePaul University
U. S. A.

Middle Platonism

The period designated by historians of philosophy as the "Middle Platonic" begins with Antiochus of Ascalon (ca. 130-68 B.C.E.) and ends with Plotinus (204-70 C.E.), who is considered the founder of Neoplatonism. The Middle Platonic philosophers inherited the exegetical and speculative problems of the Old Academy, established by Plato and continued by his successors Speusippus (ca. 407-339 B.C.E.), Xenocrates (ca. 396-314 B.C.E.) , and Polemo (ca. 350-267 B.C.E.). Many of these problems centered about the interpretation of Plato's so-called Unwritten Doctrines, inspired by Pythagorean philosophy and involving a primordial, generative pair of first principles—the One and the Dyad—and how to square this doctrine with the account of creation given in the Timaeus dialogue. This was also the main concern of the Neopythagorean philosophy that emerged with the work of Ocellus Lucanus in the second century B.C., whose treatise On the Nature of the Universe shows the influence of both Platonic and Aristotelian conceptions.

The Academy took a new turn after the founding of the Stoic school by Zeno of Citium (334-262 B.C.), a pupil of Polemo. Arcesilaus (ca. 315-241 B.C.E.) is regarded as the founder of the New Academy, known for its skepticism. Later, Antiochus asserted the fundamental harmony of the Platonic, Peripatetic (Aristotelian), and Stoic philosophies, and Eudorus of Alexandria (fl. ca. 25 B.C.E.) elucidated the highly influential teleological dogma of Platonism: "likeness to god as far as possible" (Plato, Theaetetus 176b). Other important Middle Platonists were Philo of Alexandria (ca. 30 B.C.E.—45 C.E.), who interpreted Hebrew Scripture along Platonic lines, exercising an immense influence on developing Christianity; Plutarch of Chaeronea (ca. 45-125 A.D.) whose treatise De Iside et Osiride ("On Isis and Osiris"), with its Greco-Egyptian syncretism, is an important example of the religious tendencies of later Middle Platonic philosophy; and Numenius of Apamea (fl. 150-176 C.E.) whose highly syncretic philosophy exercised a profound influence on Plotinus, who was accused of plagiarizing Numenius.

In addition to these "mainstream" philosophers, the Middle Platonic period includes the more esoteric systems of the Gnostics, the Corpus Hermeticum and the Chaldaean Oracles. All of these involved an "astral piety" with a notion of planetary powers and intra-cosmic daemons mediating between humanity and the highest cosmic deities.

Table of Contents

  1. Plato's "Unwritten Doctrines"
  2. The Old Academy
    1. Speusippus
    2. Xenocrates
    3. Polemo
    4. Other Important Members of the Old Academy
  3. Skepticism and the New Academy
    1. Arcesilaus
    2. Carneades
  4. The Beginning of Middle Platonism
    1. Philo of Larissa
    2. Antiochus of Ascalon
    3. Posidonius
  5. Neopythagorean Philosophy
    1. Ocellus Lucanus
    2. Timaeus Locrus
    3. Archytas
    4. Eudorus of Alexandria
  6. Later Middle Platonism
    1. Philo of Alexandria
    2. Plutarch of Chaeronea
    3. Numenius of Apamea
    4. Albinus
  7. "Esoteric" Platonism
    1. Hermeticism
    2. Gnosticism
    3. The Chaldaean Oracles
  8. Conclusion
  9. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Plato's "Unwritten Doctrines"

Platonic philosophy did not originate solely with the Dialogues of Plato. There is ample evidence from antiquity that Plato taught certain doctrines within the Academy that he did not write down; moreover, these doctrines were sufficiently vague as to cause divergent interpretations even among the first three successors of Plato in the Academy. It is these doctrines -- perhaps even moreso than the Dialogues (excepting the Timaeus) - from which are derived the problems and approaches characteristic of Middle Platonic thought. A basic outline of these doctrines follows.

Drawing upon Pythagorean mathematical theory, Plato began his metaphysical schema with a pair of opposed first principles, the One and the Indefinite Dyad. The One is the active principle which imposes limit on the indefinite or unlimited Dyad, thereby laying the ground for the orderly construction of the cosmos. Through this influence of the One upon the Dyad numbers are generated, that is, the Decad, which in turn generates all other numbers. The most important of these primordial numbers is the tetraktys, numbers one through four, the sum total of which is ten, the Decad. The tetraktys also was interpreted by Plato as generating the four mathematical dimensions, with the number one corresponding to the point, two to the line, three to the plane, and four to the solid. Between the Ideal-Numbers or Decad Plato places the World-Soul, corresponding roughly to the Demiurge of the Timaeus. The World-Soul mediates between the Ideal realm and matter, projecting the four dimensions on base matter in order to form the four elements, Fire, Air, Water, and Earth. This basic schema of a first and second principle, and third intellectual and craftsmanly principle responsible for forming the cosmos, was to have an immense influence on the history of Greek philosophy, especially the period reviewed in this article. The following cryptic passage from the Platonic Second Letter (generally accepted as from Plato's hand in antiquity) had a profound effect on the imagination of Platonic and Pythagorean philosophers of the Middle and Neoplatonic periods. This passage, though more than likely written by a student of Plato, nevertheless provides a hint of what the teacher's more esoteric teachings may have been like.

Upon the king of all do all things turn; he is the end of all things and the cause of all good. Things of the second order turn upon the second principle, and those of the third order upon the third (312e, tr. G.R. Morrow, in J.M. Cooper, ed., 1997).

Among the many problems inherited by Plato's successors and their students and colleagues are included the questions of whether the creation of the cosmos, as described in the Timaeus, took place in time or is atemporal, and the manner in which Demiurge of that dialogue relates to the World-Soul of the unwritten doctrines.

2. The Old Academy

The term "Old Academy" is used to refer to the educational institution established by Plato in Athens, and run by his three immediate successors. This is to differentiate it from the "New Academy," so-called because of its turn toward a more sceptical mode of philosophizing.

a. Speusippus

After the death of Plato the headship of the Academy passed to his nephew Speusippus (ca. 407-339 B.C.), according to Plato's wishes. Speusippus seems to have revised Plato's doctrine of the One and the Dyad by placing the One above Intellect, declaring that it is superior to Being and "free[ing] it even from the status of a principle" (fragment in Klibansky 1953, tr. Dillon 1977, p. 12). In this he differed, as Dillon observes, "with all official Platonism up to Plotinus" (p. 18). The result of this difference is that the Dyad is now considered the sole productive source of multiplicity, from which all other levels of reality derive. Speusippus elaborated a multi-layered cosmic schema in ten stages or "grades" (Zeller 1955, p. 169) of Being: 1.) the supreme One beyond Being, 2.) the Indefinite Dyad or the Many (producer of multiplicity), 3.) Number (beginning with three, the first stage of multiplicity), 4.) the Soul, source of all geometrical extension, 5.) the celestial bodies, 6.) all ensouled beings, including irrational animals and plants, 7.) Thought, and the seven planets and the seven Greek vowels, 8.) instinct and the passions, 9.) motion, 10.) the Good, and repose. By locating the Good at the end of this emanative process - which is properly understood, as Zeller (1955, p. 169) writes, as "eternal principles of things and their stages of development" - Speusippus is not denying the ontological supremacy of the One, rather he is recognizing the One as the most simplex and primordial of all realities, and as "the cause of goodness and being for all other things" (Dillon 1977, p. 12). According to Speusippus the cosmos is eternally generated; therefore, he interpreted the creation account in the Timaeus as intended for purposes of instruction, and not to be taken literally. In the sphere of ethics Speusippus seems to have taught that happiness is leading a moral life, which likely meant for him a median between pleasure and pain, both of which, according to Aulus Gellius (Noctes Atticae IX, 5.4), Speusippus considered to be evils.

b. Xenocrates

Xenocrates (ca. 396-314 B.C.) succeeded Speusippus as headmaster of the Academy, and held that post for a quarter of a century (339-314 B.C.), until his death. He departed from Speusippus in identifying the One as Intellect or Nous, which he also named "Father"; the Dyad he called "Mother." There is evidence that Xenocrates identified the Dyad with primordial Matter (fragment 28; Dillon 1977, p. 24), and considered it an "evil and disorderly principle" (Dillon, p. 26). Xenocrates divided the sensible universe into the realm above the moon (the supra-lunar) and the realm below the moon (the sub-lunar). It is unclear whether he added a further division to include a purely intelligible realm, or considered the One and the Dyad as occupying the highest sphere above the stars. Above the moon there exists the seven planets, which Xenocrates considered to be divine, along with the stars and the pure fire that is the base element of the universe. The realm below the moon he believed to be occupied by daemons. He held a theory that there are two types of gods, Olympians and Titans, the former born of heaven and the latter of earth (fragments 18 and 20; Dillon, pp. 26-27, also see Zeller 1955, p. 170). Theophrastus, the pupil of Aristotle, gave credit to Xenocrates for his exhaustive account of the cosmos, distinguishing him from Speusippus and others who only provided an account of the One and the Dyad, barely touching upon anything else besides numbers and geometrical shapes. Xenocrates, he says, discoursed not only on divine things and mathematicals, but on objects of sense-perception as well (Theophrastus, Metaphysics 6a.23-6b.9). Perhaps the most important contribution of Xenocrates to the history of Platonism (and all of philosophy as well) is the doctrine that the Ideas are thoughts in the mind of the One (Dillon, p. 29). Xenocrates made a distinction between practical and scientific wisdom, and taught that happiness is to be found in virtue and the means conducive to it (Zeller, p. 170).

c. Polemo

Xenocrates was succeeded by Polemo (ca. 350-267 B.C.), who became headmaster of the Academy upon the latter's death in 314. Eduard Zeller, in his seminal work on the history of Greek philosophy, remarks that there is a scarcity of original thinking in the work of Polemo (Zeller 1955, p. 170). This is unfair, not only because we do not possess any works of Polemo by which to accurately judge him, but because if one looks carefully at the surviving evidence, Polemo's importance for the emergence and development of Stoic philosophy will be seen. While it is true that Polemo's metaphysical schema was likely dependent upon his predecessors, with little or no development, he did make at least two important contributions to ethics, both of which influenced emerging Stoicism. The first is the concept of self-sufficiency (autarkheia), which Polemo identified as the key to happiness. He understood self-sufficiency in respect of virtue, and not in terms of material wealth or bodily pleasure, teaching that one could be happy even in the absence of all physical comfort, provided that one had achieved virtue. The second is the concept of conciliation or appropriation (oikeiôsis), which was of immense importance for later Stoic philosophers. The basic presumption of this doctrine is that all living beings strive for conciliation with their environment, and that this necessarily involves an existence in accordance with nature which, for human beings, is a virtuous existence. There is evidence in Cicero that Polemo taught such a doctrine, but we have no way of knowing whether he actually used the term oikeiôsis.

d. Other Important Members of the Old Academy

Besides the headmasters of the Old Academy discussed above, other pupils of Plato made contributions to Platonic philosophy. The astronomer and mathematician Philip of Opus, believed by most scholars to be the author of the pseudo-Platonic dialogue Epinomis, taught that the greatest wisdom is to be attained through contemplation of the divine celestial bodies. However, he placed importance as well on the intermediary capacity of the daemons in this endeavor. Following Plato in the Laws (896e-898d) he taught a doctrine of an evil World-Soul. Eudoxus of Cnidus was a pupil of Plato as well as of the Pythagorean Archytas. He believed that the Forms reside in material mixtures, and that pleasure is the highest good. It is likely that Plato wrote his Philebus in response to Eudoxus' theory of pleasure. Heraclides of Pontus was an astronomer who borrowed the Pythagorean theory of the diurnal revolution of the earth, and revised it with his own theory that Mercury and Venus revolve around the sun. He held a materialistic view of the soul, believing it to be composed of aether, the purest element. Finally, Crantor of Soloe (ca. 330-270 B.C.) achieved fame as author of the first commentary on Plato's Timaeus, and for his widely read treatise On Grief, an early example of the consolation genre of writing found much later in Boethius. Against the Stoics he argued that all pain, including grief, is a necessity, and is to be controlled rather than eradicated (Dillon, p. 42, Zeller pp. 171-172). He followed Plato and the Pythagoreans in regarding life as a punishment, and philosophy as practice for death.

3. Skepticism and the New Academy

The designation "New Academy" is intended to represent the shift away from exegesis of Plato's doctrines and metaphysical speculation, toward a more sceptical mode of philosophizing. The following two philosophers are its major representatives.

a. Arcesilaus

Scholars generally consider the "New Academy" to have begun with Arcesilaus (ca. 315-240 B.C.) who, under the influence of Pyrrhonian skepticism called into question the idea that knowledge and certainty is obtainable through sense-perception, denying that even reason or understanding is capable of arriving at uncontestable truth. In this he was attacking Stoic cosmology and theology, with its belief in an eternally ordered universe pervaded by reason. His skepticism was so thorough that he refused even to declare the validity of his own sceptical stance. He did not, however, do away with all criteria for living a proper life, considering perception as linked to the will, and rational activity as following a judgment based on probability of desired effect.

b. Carneades

Carneades (214-129 B.C.) followed Arcesilaus in his sceptical approach, and honed the latter's notion of probability, recognizing three "grades" of probability involving increasing levels of validation based on mutual confirmation of related representations (Zeller, p. 264). Carneades, like Arcesilaus, attacked Stoic doctrine, especially the idea of "conceptual representations" (phantasia katalêptikê), arguing that there exists no representation that cannot be convincingly reproduced by artificials means; therefore, we can never be certain that the representation we are experiencing is true or authentic. He likely followed Arcesilaus in the realm of ethics, adopting judgment based on probability as the guide for practical life.

4. The Beginning of Middle Platonism

Scholars generally consider the Middle Platonic period to have begun with the work of Antiochus of Ascalon (d. 68 B.C.), who was responsible for overhauling the increasingly stifling skepticism of the New Academy. His teacher was Philo of Larissa (fl. 88-79 B.C.), who also taught Cicero. We will examine briefly the teachings of Philo, before moving on to Antiochus. We will then discuss Posidonius who, though a Stoic rather than a Platonist, contributed much to the development of Middle Platonic philosophy.

a. Philo of Larissa

Unlike his predecessors in the New Academy, Philo of Larissa did not consider knowledge an impossibility, although he did follow them in criticizing the Stoic doctrine of "conceptual representations" as the key to knowledge. However, he sought not to deny all possibility of knowledge, but rather to establish a middle course between mere probability, and knowledge. He believed that there is a level of obviousness where skepticism must give way to conviction, although this conviction must not be regarded as absolute knowledge. Philo's main concern was with ethics, and he used his middle ground approach to formulate a detailed ethical theory in a manner never attempted by Arcesilaus or Carneades.

b. Antiochus of Ascalon

The fundamental agreement of Platonic, Stoic, and Peripatetic philosophy was asserted by Antiochus of Ascalon, who returned to the basic approach, if not the actual doctrines, of the Old Academy. This notion of agreement of the earlier philosophers on matters of doctrine served as a way for Antiochus to get past the skepticism of his teacher, in order to establish his own philosophical stance. What we know of Antiochus' doctrines is contained in various writings of Cicero, usually placed in the mouth of Antiochus' influential pupil Varro. No writings of Antiochus survive; therefore, as with all of the philosophers discussed so far - with the exception of Plato - we must rely solely on reports by contemporaries, near contemporaries, and later writers. Nevertheless, it is possible to reconstruct with some confidence the doctrines put forth by Antiochus.

Antiochus, likely for the first time since the advent of academic skepticism, busied himself with the interpretation of Plato's dialogues, notably the Timaeus, as the Old Academics had done, thereby providing us with the first example of what would later become a full-fledged systematic approach in the later Middle Platonists. Antiochus rejected the Aristotelian "fifth element" and returned to the four basic elements - Fire, Air, Water, and Earth - as the primary material principles of the cosmos. Matter (hulê) is the substrate of these elements. Following Stoic philosophy, Antiochus taught that the stars and planets, as well as minds, are composed of the purest fire. Even god is composed of this fire and does not transcend the cosmos, but occupies its highest reaches. He combined the Demiurge of the Timaeus and the World-Soul of the Unwritten Doctrines into an intra-cosmic, unitive, rational force which he termed Logos. Antiochus denied that the Platonic Ideas or Forms transcend the cosmos, asserting instead that they are conceptions common to all humanity, constructed by way of analogies (similitudines, analogiai), and existing only within the mind of each rational being, including god (Cicero, De oratore 8 ff.). Like Xenocrates earlier, Antiochus understood the Ideas as thoughts in the mind of god (Dillon, pp. 94-95).

With the rise of Stoicism as the most influential dogmatic philosophy of the Hellenistic era, the problem of fate versus free will came to the fore, and Antiochus responded by rejecting fate (heimarmenê) as an efficient cause, relegating it to the class of "material cause" (aition prokatarktikon), along with time, matter, and other things that are necessary, but not sufficient, to produce an effect. This allowed for efficient causes to arise from human initiative, and preserved the freedom of human activity, or at least response, within an ordered cosmos.

Again following Xenocrates, Antiochus expressed a belief in daemons, who inhabit the sub-lunar realm (the supra-lunar realm being reserved for the divine celestial bodies). He also appears to have believed in divination, not only through the motion of the celestial bodies, but by way of dreams, oracles, beasts, and even inanimate objects (Cicero, De divinatione I.12 ff.; Dillon, p. 89).

While not a strikingly brilliant philosopher - at least as far as we can tell from surviving accounts of his doctrines - Antiochus is responsible for articulating themes that would later become prominent in Platonic philosophy. His notion of the Ideas as thoughts in the mind of god was accepted as authentic Platonic doctrine by Philo of Alexandria, who gave it his own unique spin, as we shall see; the problem of the Demiurge and the World-Soul was taken up by Numenius in rather gnosticizing fashion, as we will discuss; and Antiochus' teaching regarding divination and daemons is a precedent of the Neoplatonic system of Iamblichus (who, due to his later date, will not be discussed in this article).

c. Posidonius

Although not a Platonist, strictly speaking, but a Stoic, Posidonius (135-51 B.C.) nevertheless exercised an immense influence on the development of Middle Platonic thought. Among his many works, all unfortunately lost except for a few scant fragments, is a commentary on the Timaeus, which was likely the main source of his influence on Platonism. Posidonius recognized two principles in the cosmos, one active and one passive: god and matter, respectively. In this he was following Plato's doctrine of the mixing bowl, as put forth in the Timaeus. In his cosmology, Posidonius posited, as did Platonists like Xenocrates and Antiochus, a bipartite cosmos consisting of a supra- and a sub-lunar realm. He considered the supra-lunar realm to be imperishable, and the sub-lunar perishable, dissolving into the void (kenon) outside the cosmos during the conflagration (ekpurôsis), after which it is reconstituted anew (this being a variation of standard Stoic doctrine going back to Chrysippus). Posidonius understood human beings as forming a bridge between these two realms, and theorized that souls originate in the sun and travel to earth by way of the moon (Zeller, pp. 269-270). Some of these souls become humans while others become daemons or heroes, a doctrine developed in his treatise On Heroes and Demons, which had an immense influence on later Platonists, especially Plutarch.

Posidonius believed that the cosmos is held together by cosmic sympathy (sumpatheia), and this formed the basis for his ideas concerning fate and divination (cf. Cicero, De divinatione I, and De fato). He believed the cosmos to be controlled by three forces, Zeus, Nature, and Fate, and that human beings cannot escape the causality that is the source of cosmic unity. This led Posidonius naturally to a belief in astrology, and there is ample evidence that he practiced it as well (fragments 111, 112, Edelstein-Kidd). He also theorized regarding other forms of divination, and from his doctrine of cosmic sympathy arrived at the conclusion that all life and events in the cosmos are connected, making divination from an animal's liver, for example, possible. Posidonius asserted the immortality of the soul and its ability to exist apart from the body. In ethics he largely followed Plato, teaching that the passions are not to be eradicated but controlled (Zeller, p. 270, Dillon, pp. 109-112).

5. Neopythagorean Philosophy

During the late second century and early first century B.C. a number of writings began to appear that were attributed to various historical followers of Pythagoras. This renewed interest in Pythagorean philosophy likely grew out of the desire to find harmony between the three major philosophical schools of the era. The writings compromising the Pseudo-Pythagorica, as the collection of about ninety treatises by fifty authors is often called, contain elements of Platonism, Stoicism, and Peripatetic philosophy, as well as typical Pythagorean number theory and cosmological motifs, such as the eternity of the world. There is little, in fact, to differentiate Neopythagoreanism from Middle Platonism, as one can easily find Pythagorean elements in the work of thinkers commonly designated as Platonists, and vice-versa. Following John Dillon in his definitive study of Middle Platonism, however, I am making the distinction for the sake of scholarly rigor.

a. Ocellus Lucanus

Of the writings of Ocellus Lucanus (second century B.C.) we possess a treatise On the Nature of the Universe and a fragment of a lost treatise On Laws. Ocellus was concerned with maintaining the doctrine of the eternity of the world against the Stoic doctrine of periodic conflagration and reconstitution of the universe. Since there are only two types of generation - from a lesser to a greater state and vice-versa - Ocellus argued that it is just as absurd to state that the universe began in a lesser state and progressed to a greater, as it is to state the opposite, for both statements imply either a growth or a diminution, and since the cosmos is whole and self-contained (so he insisted) there is no place into which it can either grow or diminish. Posidonius' doctrine of a void into which the cosmos periodically dissolves held no place in Ocellus' philosophy.

Although positing the eternity of the cosmos, Ocellus nevertheless admitted the obvious, that generation and dissolution occurs here on earth. Like Xenocrates and other Platonists, Ocellus understood the cosmos as divided in two parts, the supra-lunar and the sub-lunar, the gods existing in the former and daemons and humans in the latter. It is only in the sub-lunar regions, he argued, that generation and decay occurs, for it is in this region that "nonessential" beings undergo alteration according to nature. The generation that occurs in the sub-lunar realm is produced by the supra-lunar realm, the primary cause being the sun, and the secondary causes the planets. He apparently did not believe in a transcendent realm beyond the material cosmos.

Ocellus' work is one of the earliest examples of Hellenistic-era astrological doctrine. At the end of his On the Nature of the Universe he entreats prospective parents to be attentive in choosing times of conception, so that their children may be born noble and graceful; and in the fragment On Laws he declares that the active supra-lunar realm governs the passive sub-lunar realm. In his ethical doctrine Ocellus adhered to strict Pythagorean asceticism, holding that sexual intercourse is to be reserved for reproductive purposes only, and that alchoholic beverages are to be avoided.

b. Timaeus Locrus

Scholars are not certain whether the eponymous Timaeus Locrus of Plato's dialogue ever really existed. In any case, the treatise On the World and the Soul attributed to this person is an early to mid-first century B.C. work containing an epitome of the Timaeus dialogue, though with some omissions. Given the renewed interest in Pythagorean philosophy in this period, it is likely that the work was widely read. Though containing clear Pythagorean motifs, such as a table of musical tones and their respective numbers, and a section elaborating the geometrical construction of the cosmos, the treatise is, as Thomas Tobin (1985) has demonstrated, a Middle Platonic interpretation of the highly Pythagorean-influenced Timaeus dialogue.

According to "Timaeus" the universe has two causes: Mind, which governs rational beings, and Necessity, which governs bodies and all irrational beings. Interpreting Plato literally, "Timaeus" affirmed the temporal creation of the cosmos, and while stating that the cosmos is capable of being destroyed by the one who created it (the Demiurge), he denied that it would ever actually be destroyed, since it is divine and the Demiurge, being good and divine himself, would never destroy divinity. In what is possibly a later addition to the text, "Timaeus" assigns numerical values to the various proportions produced by the mixture of the Same and the Different (these being the two opposing forces, productive of all motion, growth, and change in the cosmos, as discussed in the Timaeus dialogue). The substratum of all generated things is matter, and their reason-principle or logos is ideal-form. "Timaeus" then proceeds with an account of the geometrical proportions of the cosmos, finally declaring that the image of the cosmos is the dodecahedron, since that is the closest approximation to the perfect sphere, which is the image of purely intellectual reality.

According to "Timaeus," the Demiurge initiated the creation of souls, but then handed over completion of the task to Nature (hypostatized in the feminine) who completed their creation and introduced them into into the cosmos, some by way of the sun, others the moon, and yet more from the planets that wander according to the principle of the Different (the source of the irrational part of the soul). Each soul, however, received a portion of the principle of Sameness, which became the rational part of the soul. A soul who received more of this principle would have a happier fate than one receiving less. Here again, as in Ocellus, we have a relatively early witness of astrological doctrine within Hellenistic philosophy. The ethical doctrine of "Timaeus" involved a taming of the passions and the moderation of bodily pleasures, the final goal being a state of repose conducive to the contemplation of divine things.

c. Archytas

Several fragments purporting to be from the hand of Plato's contemporary, the Pythagorean Archytas of Tarentum (though in fact composed some time during the late second or early first century B.C.) are of importance for Middle Platonic philosophy, notably the fragments of a treatise On First Principles where a principle is posited above the One and the Dyad, out of which the primordial pair is said to have emerged. "Archytas" places mind above soul as the most divine part in man, though he departs from standard Pythagoreanism by assigning the circle rather than the tetragon as the representation of the soul, since the soul is self-moved (the circle, with no definite beginning or end point, symbolized endless movement). He believed that there is a space outside of the material cosmos in which the cosmos is contained. Time, according to "Archytas" is continuous, not a series of units or parts as in number, speech, and music, and he apparently made some distinction between psychic time (pertaining to the soul) and natural time, though what this distinction entailed is not clear. In ethics he is no innovator, simply stating the standard notion that happiness depends on virtue, but virtue is independent of all other things.

d. Eudorus of Alexandria

Eudorus of Alexandria (fl. ca. 50-25 B.C.) was much concerned with ethics, which he considered the first subject of philosophy to be studied. He defined ethics not in terms of existence in accordance with nature, but rather in terms of striving for a proper end (telos), which he considered to be "likeness to god as far as possible" (homoiôsis theô kata to dunaton). This phrase is from Plato's Theaetetus (176b) where the qualification "as far as possible" simply means to the extent that a mortal can achieve a divine state. Eudorus, however, interpreted it as referring to the intellect, that part of the soul most closely akin to the divine (cf. Dillon, pp. 122-123). This conception of ethics led Eudorus to depart from earlier Platonists like Antiochus who considered physical pleasures as contributing to, or at least enhancing, the happiness that depends on virtue, and declare that true happiness is of the intellect alone, although he does seem to have allowed a preliminary role for physical pleasure in achieving happiness (Dillon, p. 124).

In metaphysics and cosmology Eudorus follows largely Pythagorean lines, though some Stoic conceptions are present in his thought. He departed from earlier Pythagorean philosophy and, in a move likely inspired by "Archytas," posited a supreme principle above the One and the Dyad, even positing this principle as the producer of matter. Traditional Pythagorean philosophy posited a primordial pair of principles, Limit and Unlimited, with no supreme One above this pair. The monism of Eudorus' doctrine was particularly attractive to the Jewish Platonist Philo of Alexandria in his quest to square Old Testament theology with Platonic philosophy.

Eudorus rejected the Aristotelian "fifth element" and followed Stoic cosmology in positing pure fire as the base element of he heavens. He considered the stars and planets to be divine, and insisted that the world is eternal. Eudorus brought together the apparently opposing views of Xenocrates and Crantor regarding the origin of numbers; the former stating that they are produced by the One and the Dyad, the latter that they are produced in the mind of the World-Soul as he contemplates the Forms. Eudorus taught that number was generated simultaneously with the World-Soul, who was responsible for translating the smallest multiplicity (the number three) into solid bodies (the number four).

Finally, we must note Eudorus' revision of Aristotle's Categories, which was to exercise an immense influence on later Platonists, especially Porphyry, who endeavored to find a harmony of doctrine in Plato and Aristotle. Eudorus interpreted substance (ousia) as strictly material substance, and concluded that Aristotle's categories only apply to the physical world, not to the purely intellectual realm, where Platonists have always located supreme reality.

6. Later Middle Platonism

Notable Middle Platonists after Eudorus include Moderatus of Gades (first century A.D.), a self-conscious Pythagorean who considered Plato a mere student of Pythagoras. During the same period Thrasyllus, Nero's court astrologer, prepared a new edition of Plato's Dialogues, arranged in tetralogies, as well as an edition of the collected works of Democritus. Interesting in a different manner is Apollonius of Tyana, who had the reptuation of a magician and wonder-worker, and is a prime example of the prophet-figures influenced by Platonism, Pythagoreanism, and sundry other intellectual streams. Another example of such a figure is Simon Magus (mid-first century A.D.) who wandered about working miracles with a prostitute claiming to be Divine Wisdom Herself. Simon was considered the first Gnostic by the early Christian heresiologists.

The most important Middle Platonists after Eudorus are Philo of Alexandria (ca. 30 B.C. - 45 A.D.) and Plutarch of Chaeronea (ca. 45-125 A.D.). Numenius of Apamea (fl. ca. 150-176 A.D.), though more of a Neopythagorean than a Platonist (to the extent that such a distinction can be made in this period), had a profound influence on the emergence of Neoplatonism, not least in the deep and abiding influence his thought had on the philosophical development of Plotinus, who was actually accused of plagiarizing Numenius. Finally, we will discuss Albinus (fl. ca. 149-157) whose handbook of Platonic philosophy is an interesting example of Middle Platonic eclecticism (in the best sense of that term).

a. Philo of Alexandria

The work of Philo of Alexandria (also called Philo Judaeus) is the most prominent and philosophically accomplished example of the Jewish-Hellenistic syncretism that flourished at Alexandria beginning at least as early as the translation of the Hebrew Scriptures into Greek (the Septuagint), during the reign of Ptolemy II Philedelphus (285-247 B.C.). We already detect the influence of Hellenistic philosophy on Jewish thought in the biblical book of Ecclesiastes, and the later apocryphal work Wisdom of Sirach (ca. 30 B.C.) displays Platonic and Pythagorean affinities. So it is clear that by Philo's time Jewish thinkers of the Diaspora were quite comfortable with Greek philosophy. In the work of Philo himself there is an attempt to square Old Testament theology with the Greek philosophical tradition, leading Philo to posit Moses as the first sage and teacher of the venerable ancients of the Greek tradition. The work of Philo was to have an immense influence on emerging Christian philosophy, especially in the work of Origen.

According to Philo, God transcends all first principles, including the Monad, is incorporeal and cannot even be said to occupy a space or place; He is eternal, changeless, self-sufficient and free from all constraint or necessity (cf. Tripolitis 1978, pp. 5-6 ff.). God freely willed the creation of the cosmos, first in a purely intellectual manner, and then, through the agency of His Logos (Philo's philosophical term for the Wisdom figure of Proverbs 8:22) He brought forth the physical cosmos. Philo describes the Logos in a two-fold manner, first as the sum total of the thoughts of God, and then as a hypostatization of those thoughts for the purpose of physical creation. Thus we see Philo linking the cosmos to the intellectual realm by way of a mediating figure rather like the Platonic World-Soul. Borrowing a term from Stoic philosophy, Philo calls the thoughts of the Logos "rational seeds" (logoi spermatikoi), and describes them as having a role in the production of the cosmos which, he insists, was brought into being out of non-being by the agency of God.

Philo adhered to standard Platonism when he declared that the cosmos is a copy of the purely intellectual realm. However, he taught, following biblical doctrine, that the cosmos was created in time, but went on to state that, although having a temporal creation, the cosmos will exist eternally, since it is the result of God's outpouring of love. The rational beings dwelling in the cosmos are divided by Philo into three types: the purely intellectual souls (created first by God), all animals (created second), and finally man (last of all rational creation, combining the attributes of the first two). Of the purely intellectual and incorporeal souls, Philo recognized varying degrees of perfection; some of the souls aid humanity, for example, providing guidance and giving signs, while other fell into vice themselves, and aim to lead man astray. These are the beings called angels by the Jews and daemons by the Greeks.

Philo's ethical doctrine emphasized the free will of human beings. According to Philo, the meaning of the biblical statement that humanity is created in the image and likeness of God is that although sometimes constrained by external forces, all human souls are capable of overcoming these constraints and attaining freedom. He further adds, in a formulation that was to have a profound influence on Origen, that God aids souls in their quest for freedom in proportion to their love and devotion for Him and for their fellows.

b. Plutarch of Chaeronea

Plutarch was intensely interested in religion, and his philosophy bears the stamp of a profound religious piety. Like Eudorus, Plutarch understood the highest goal of existence as achieving likeness to god, yet he had little confidence in the ability of human reason to adequately contemplate and understand divinity, believing instead in the possibility of divine revelations. Plutarch considered all the religions of his time as bearing witness to one eternal truth, though expressed in different ways. His ability to use allegory in order to prove this assertion is most evident in his treatise On Isis and Osiris.

Plutarch did not, like Archytas and Eudorus, posit a principle higher than the Pythagorean One, which Plutarch also called, in Platonic fashion, the Good. The Dyad was considered by Plutarch as a disruptive or even downright evil principle, which the One or Monad had to struggle to control. This tension at the highest ontological level translates into a dualistic cosmology where the principle of reason is described as being in constant strife with unreason. The rational principle, Logos, is both transcendent and immanent. In its former aspect the Logos is understood by Plutarch as the sum-total of thoughts in the mind of god; in its latter aspect, Logos is understood allegorically as Osiris, whose body is routinely torn apart by Typhon, only to be reassembled ever again by Isis. Osiris' body parts are interpreted as the Ideas dispersed throughout the material realm, and rationally maintained by Isis in her demiurgic role as cosmic steward.

Plutarch departed from standard Pythagorean doctrine in declaring the creation of the cosmos in time. In keeping with his Zoroastrian-style dualism, Plutarch posited a simultaneous intellectual conception of the created cosmos in the minds of both the One and its evil counterpart, the Dyad. Thus we see a dualism at the highest level of his thought; however, a dualism that is not akin to Gnosticism, for Plutarch's opposing principles are equi-primordial, unlike the subversive Sophia in Gnostic mythology, who introduces a disruptive element into the intellectual realm.

Plutarch accepted the immortality of the soul, excepting only the notion of transmigration or reincarnation, and made the distinction, found again later in Origen, between mind (nous) and soul (psukhê). In the realm of ethics, Plutarch defended free will against fatalism, understanding divine providence (pronoia) as involving a co-operation between human will and divine agency (cf. Dillon, pp. 199-203 ff.; also Zeller, pp. 306-308), another notion later adopted by Origen.

c. Numenius of Apamea

Numenius has been called both a pythagorizing Platonist and a platonizing Pythagorean. However, the key to his attitude toward philosophy is summed up in his own statement that "Plato pythagorizes" (P. Henry 1991, p. lxx). He took the mysterious passage about the three kings in the Platonic Second Letter as coming from Socrates, and he likely used this passage as support for the triad of gods which he posited as first principles. Plato and Pythagoras were considered by him as the twin sources of philosophical truth, with which the traditions of the Hebrews, Egyptians, the Zoroastrian Magi, and even the Brahmins were all in agreement.

Numenius' triad of gods begins with the First God, called also the Good, who is eternal, immutable, and at rest, concerned only with the intellectual realm. He is likened by Numenius to the owner of a farm who, after having sown the fields, leaves it up to his farmhands to cultivate the crops. The Second God, called Mind and Demiurge is responsible for translating the things of the intellectual realm to the realm of matter, thereby establishing a cosmos. In this capacity the Second God is called World-Soul. However, once this Soul comes into contact with matter, the source of all evil according to Numenius, it becomes divided into a rational and an irrational part, the former remaining in contemplation of the divine realm, and the latter immersing itself in the material realm. It is not clear whether Numenius intended to posit two World-Souls (one good, one evil) or if he had in mind simply a division within that Soul of an irrational and a rational part. If Numenius' triad involves a strict separation of three distinct divinities (and this is a matter of interpretation) then we should speak of a separate World-Soul that is evil. If the triad is intended to imply a three-fold series of activities emanating from the divine realm, then we are correct in assuming that Numenius posited a single World-Soul with two warring parts. Due to the fragmentary nature of his surviving writings, however, it is impossible to know for sure what he intended.

Human souls were described by Numenius as divine fragments of the Demiurge, each one a microcosm of both the intellectual and the physical realm (Tripolitis, pp. 26-30). He taught that all souls contain both a rational and an irrational element, the former derived from the Second God, the latter from association with the material realm. Numenius taught that souls enter the cosmos by way of the Tropic of Cancer, acquiring various characteristics as they pass through the seven planetary spheres. The soul that leads a virtuous life - which for Numenius meant living a contemplative life detached from bodily things - will re-ascend to heaven (the sphere of the fixed stars) by way of the Tropic of Capricorn. The soul that fails to lead a correct life will enter Hades (located by Numenius in the mists above the world) where it will undergo chastisement until reincarnated in another body suitable to its nature. Numenius taught that certain souls may become so corrupted that they will enter the bodies of animals. In a doctrine that likely influenced Origen (in his doctrine of multiple ages), Numenius taught that the series of reincarnations are finite, and will eventually lead the soul back to the divine realm, though how this is accomplished for a soul existing in animal bodies is not entirely clear, since such a soul is presumably not susceptible to any rational exhortations to virtue.

No overtly ethical fragments of Numenius' works survive, but we do know that he considered existence in this realm a struggle, with the irrational part of the soul in constant strife with the rational. Salvation from this state only takes place when the soul leaves the material realm for the divine. One is reminded of St. Paul's lament in Romans 7:18-23 where he describes the war taking place between his flesh (body, matter) and his mind. His mind knows the good, he says, but his flesh continually prevents him from achieving this good. It is possible that Numenius read St. Paul, but more likely that the two thinkers simply were responding to a shared intellectual milieu consisting not only of Platonic philosophy, but Gnostic and Hermetic doctrines as well.

The influence of Numenius extended well beyond his life-time; his doctrines are recorded in the writings of later Neoplatonists like Porphyry and Proclus, and Plotinus himself was at one point accused of plagiarizing Numenius (Porphyry, Life of Plotinus 17). In the case of Plotinus, we see a clear Numenian influence regarding the triadic arrangement of principles, although Plotinus developed this basic notion in a quite original way. Plotinus also responded to Numenius' doctrine of an evil World-Soul, developing in the process a quite sophisticated doctrine concerning matter and the nature of evil.

d. Albinus

Albinus (fl. ca. 149-157) left behind two complete works, excellent sources of first-century A.D. Platonism, the Isagogê (an introduction to Platonic philosophy) and the Didaskalikos (a summary of Plato's philosophy). As an interpreter of Plato, Albinus relied heavily on Aristotle and, to a lesser extent, Stoicism. Like Numenius, Albinus posited a triadic set of principles: First God (also Mind and Good), Second God or Universal Intellect, and World-Soul. The First God is not described as creating the others, but rather as generating them from his mind as he thinks upon his own thoughts (cf. Tripolitis, pp. 31-36). This conception of divine emanation is present later in the philosophy of Plotinus and, in a more developed fashion, in Proclus. The First God is described along the lines of Aristotle's Unmoved Mover, and is said to produce motion through the desire he inspires in the second and third gods. Albinus employs negative or apophatic language when describing the First God, a method of theologizing that would become of immense importance for later Christian Neoplatonists, especially Pseudo-Dionysius.

Individual human souls, according to Albinus, were created in the same manner as the second and third gods, that is, by a hypostatization of thoughts in the divine mind. Once generated, the souls enter the sphere of the fixed stars, where each soul is allotted its own star and set in a chariot or vehicle (okhêma). Following the myth of the soul in the Phaedrus, Albinus states that the duty of the soul in the material realm is to place unreason in subjection to reason, and to steer one's chariot to the rim of heaven where one's allotted star is waiting to receive the perfected soul.

Although Albinus describes the life of the soul as one of constant strife between the rational and the irrational parts, he does not posit, as did Numenius, an evil World-Soul, nor does he totally degrade all material embodiment as the source of evil. Albinus described the union of body and soul as akin to that of fire and asphalt, meaning that the one is the vehicle of the other. In the realm of ethics Albinus held the by-now-standard Platonic line of "likeness to god" as the highest goal of existence. He taught a doctrine of reincarnation including the entrance of the soul into animal bodies. As in Numenius, it is unclear how souls, once so incarnated, will ever attain to the reason requisite for salvation (cf. R.E. Witt 1937, p. 139).

Albinus anticipated Plotinus in the prime role he allotted to contemplation in the ideal existence of the soul, and Origen in his doctrine of the intellectual generation of souls by the godhead.

7. "Esoteric" Platonism

This final section will be devoted to a brief discussion of a branch or offshoot of Middle Platonic thought that I hesitantly labelled "esoteric," in spite of the fact that these schools of thought or sects (or whatever one should call them) were quite widespread during this period, Gnosticism especially. However, though widespread, they were veiled in mystery and secrecy, leading John Dillon to refer to them in the perhaps more apt phrase "the Platonic Underworld." We will be discussing three examples of this "underworld": Hermeticism, Gnosticism, and the Chaldaean Oracles. The writings comprising the Corpus Hermeticum, so-called because of its supposed derivation from the teachings of the legendary sage Hermes Trismegistus, bear the marks of a variety of philosophies, Platonism and Neopythagoreanism being the most prominent. Hermetic ideas are found in Christianity as early as the writings of St. Paul, and Gnostic elements are to be discerned in John's Gospel as well as in Paul. The earliest Christian theologians were Gnostics, and the most prominent among them, Valentinus, nearly became pope. The systems of the Gnostics, especially Valentinus, attempted (among other things) to solve certain problems of Platonic and related philosophies by employing mythological language, astrological symbolism, and elements of alchemy and ritual magic. Finally, the Chaldaean Oracles, a mysterious composition melding Platonic and Neopythagorean philosophy with a revelatory religiosity, was a major source of inspiration for later Neoplatonists.

a. Hermeticism

Hermeticism is a loose label for collections of texts on various subjects bearing the name Hermes Trismegistus, "Thrice-great Hermes," who was believed to have been a sage of remote antiquity. According to the third-century B.C. historian Manetho of Sebennytos, a tradition existed in which Thoth-Hermes was said to have written down his teachings on tablets before the Flood. These tablets were said to be kept by the Egyptian priests, who later translated them into Greek. The earliest Hermetic writings are called the "technical Hermetica" and can be dated back to the early- to mid-second century B.C. These texts contain astrological material and information on the magical properties of gems. The co-called "philosophical Hermetica," that is, the treatises comprising what today is called the Corpus Hermeticum, began to be written down a bit later, the earliest probably in the mid-first century B.C.

The most important treatise in this collection (at least for the history of Platonism) is the Poimandres. This text begins with the appearance of Poimandres (a name suggesting "Shepherd of Men" in Greek), the Divine Intellect, who reveals to the unknown author of the text a vision displaying the generation of the cosmos. The cosmos is described as beginning with a darkness coiling downward from the light (the intellectual realm) like a snake. It is at first indiscernible and disturbing, but then divine reason descends upon it and imposes order, and the earth comes into being. This account is dependent on both Plato's Timaeus and the book of Genesis (especially as these two works were interpreted by Philo, whom our author likely read). The image of the descending darkness implies an evil or irrational principle, or World-Soul, as in Numenius, that must be brought under control by reason. Other affinities with Numenius, as well as Albinus, include the direct generation of souls by the Demiurge, and the descent and ascent of souls through the planetary spheres. One important difference is that both Numenius and Albinus considered the highest attainment of the soul as "likeness to god." The Poimandres, however, declares that the souls who make the ascent to the divine realm actually become gods themselves, an idea that was to become central in the Eastern Orthodox Christian tradition, with its concept of deification or theôsis. It is highly likely that Numenius was acquainted with, if not the Poimandres itself, another text or texts similar in content. He was also most certainly familiar with Gnosticism, to a discussion of which we now turn.

b. Gnosticism

The writings called "gnostic" vary in content, style, date, and region of origin, to such a degree that certain modern scholars have called for a moratorium on the term (cf. M.A. Williams 1996). Yet there are certain basic elements common to most so-called Gnostic systems, as opposed to stray texts the provenance of which is unknown or dubious. The most important of these systems is that of Basilides and Valentinus, two early Christian theologians who are influenced heavily by Middle Platonic thought. (For a more in-depth discussion, see Gnosticism.)

The system of Basilides (fl. ca. 132-135 A.D.) begins with the engendering of Intellect (Nous) by the First (unengendered) Parent. From this Intellect, Logos is generated, and Logos in turn generates Prudence (phronêsis) who then generates Wisdom (Sophia) and Power (dunamis). This is a mythological elaboration of the standard Middle Platonic emanation schemas that we have encountered in Eudorus and later philosophers, like Numenius, who have posited a supreme principle above Intellect. Basilides apparently attempted to "flesh out" the standard triadic schemas of the more mainstream Middle Platonists by adding certain anthropomorphic attributes like "prudence" to the mix. Basilides was among the first Christian thinkers besides John the Evangelist to explicitly identify Jesus as the earthly manifestation of the Divine Intellect. He also dabbled in astrology, revising practices current in his time to suit his own peculiar cosmology. Using numerology, he identified the ruler of the celestial realm as "Abrasax" or "Abraxas," a name used in the practice of ritual magic, the numerical value of which is (according to Greek numerology) 365, corresponding to the number of "heavens" believed by Gnostics and other to exist above the familiar spheres of the seven planets.

Valentinus (ca. 100-175 A.D.) begins his system, in Pythagorean fashion, not with a unity but a primal duality, the members of which he calls the Ineffable and Silence. The primal duality produces a second duality called the Parent and Truth, from which spring a quartet consisting of Logos, Life, Primal Man, and the Church. As a Christian, Valentinus held a rather peculiar notion of the nature and role of Christ in the cosmos, considering Him to have been engendered along with a "shadow" (matter) that it was His responsibility to control. Here again we see an elaboration on a particular aspect of Middle Platonism, namely the manner in which unwieldy matter is brought under control by a rationalizing force. Valentinus was apparently the first Christian theologian to refer to the Trinity in terms of persons, and he affirmed the eternity and immortality of souls, implying a notion of pre-existence of souls such as we find later in Origen.

Gnosticism had an immense influence not only on the development of Christianity but on emerging Neoplatonism as well. Plotinus, for example, was forced to respond to the increasingly vocal, it seems, Gnostics attending his lectures. Later, Iamblichus posited a One even higher than the Plotinian One, in a manner similar to Gnostics like Basilides and Valentinus who, as we have seen, separated their highest principles from all others by positing an unengendered parent, and a primal duality productive of a second duality, respectively.

c. The Chaldaean Oracles

The writings known as the Chaldaean Oracles were very likely composed by a certain Julian the Theurgist, who served in the Roman army during Marcus Aurelius' campaign against the Quadi, and claimed to have saved the Roman camp from fiery destruction by causing a rainstorm (Dillon, pp. 392-393). The circumstances surrounding the writing of the Oracles is mysterious, the most likely explanation being that Julian uttered them after inducing a sort of trance akin to that of the classical oracles of Greece (E.R. Dodds 1973, p. 284). There is much Platonic content in the Oracles, resembling very closely the philosophy of Numenius, which is why they are of interest in this survey of Middle Platonism.

The metaphysical schema of the Chaldaean Oracles begins with an absolutely transcendent deity called Father, with whom resides Power, a productive principle, it seems, whence proceeds Intellect. This Intellect has a two-fold function, to contemplate the Forms of the purely intellectual realm of the Father, and to craft and govern the material realm. In this latter capacity the Intellect is Demiurge. The Oracles further posits a barrier between the intellectual and the material realm, personified as Hecate. In the capacity of barrier, or more properly "membrane" (hupezôkôs humên), Hecate separates the two "fires," that is, the purely intellectual fire of the Father, and the material fire from which the cosmos is created, and mediates all divine influence upon the lower realm. From Hecate is derived the World-Soul, which in turn emanates Nature, the governor of the sub-lunar realm (Dillon, p. 394-395). From Nature is derived Fate, which is capable of enslaving the lower part of the human soul. The goal of existence then is to purify the lower soul of all contact with Nature and Fate, by living a life of austerity and contemplation. Salvation is achieved by an ascent through the planetary spheres, during which the soul casts off the various aspects of its lower soul, and becomes pure intellect.

8. Conclusion

It is evident, even from a brief survey such as this one, that the thinkers comprising the philosophy generally referred to as Middle Platonism held widely varying and sometimes even divergent ideas, not only on relatively minor points like the role of physical pleasure in happiness, but on major points like the eternity of the world or the number of first principles. A student encountering Middle Platonism for the first time, armed only with a knowledge of Plato's Dialogues, will likely wonder why we even call some of these thinkers Platonists at all. That is understandable. However, it must be remembered that Plato did not bequeath a set of doctrines on his students and successors; his legacy is rather a series of problems that have exercised the minds of philosophers for over two millennia. Platonism, therefore, should not be thought of a simple elucidation of Plato's doctrines, but rather as a creative engagement with Plato's texts and with certain doctrines handed down by the Academy as belonging to Plato. Middle Platonism ends with Origen of Alexandria and his younger contemporary Plotinus, both of whom were deeply indebted to many of the philosophers discussed in this article, yet moved in directions uniquely their own. It is with them that Neoplatonism begins.

9. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Albinus, Didaskalikos, ed. P. Louis, in Albinos. Épitomé (Paris: Les Belles Lettres 1945).
  • Antiochus of Ascalon, Fragmenta, in Der Akademiker Antiochus, ed. G. Luck (Bern: Haupt 1953).
  • Arcesilaus, Fragmenta, in Supplementum Hellenisticum, ed. H. Lloyd-Jones, P. Parsons (Berlin: De Gruyter 1983).
  • Archytas (pseudo-), Fragmenta, in The Pythagorean Texts of the Hellenistic Period, ed. H. Thesleff (Abo: Abo Akademi 1965).
  • Cicero, The Nature of the Gods and On Divination, tr. C.D. Yonge (New York: Prometheus Books 1997).
  • The Chaldean Oracles, tr. G.R.S. Mead (Montana: Kessinger Publishing, no date).
  • Numenius, Numénius. Fragments, ed. É. des Places (Paris: Les Belles Lettres 1974).
  • Ocellus Lucanus, De universi natura and Fragmenta, in Neue philologische Untersuchungen, vol. 1, ed. R. Harder (Berlin: Weidmann 1926).
  • Philo of Alexandria, On the Creation of the World (De opificio Mundi), Allegorical Interpretation (Legum allegoria), tr. F.H. Colson, G.H. Whitaker, in Philo, vol. 1, Loeb Classical Library (Cambridge: Harvard University Press 1929).
  • Plato, Plato: Complete Works, ed. J.M. Cooper (Indianapolis: Hackett 1997).
  • Plutarch, De Iside et Osiride, in Plutarchi moralia, vol. 2.3, ed. W. Sieveking (Leipzing: Teubner 1935).
  • Posidonius, Posidonius. Die Fragmente, vol. 1, ed. W. Theiler (Berlin: De Gruyter 1982).
  • Speusippus, Fragmenta, in Speusippus of Athens, ed. L. Tarán (Philosophia Antiqua 39; Leiden: Brill 1981).
  • Timaeus Locrus, Fragmenta et titulus, in The Pythagorean Texts of the Hellenistic Period, ed. H. Thesleff (Abo: Abo Akademi 1965).
  • Xenocrates, Testimonia, doctrina et fragmenta, in Senocrate-Ermodoro. Frammenti, ed. M.I. Parente (Naples: Bibliopolis 1982).

b. Secondary Sources

  • Billings, T.H., The Platonism of Philo Judaeus (Chicago: University of Chicago Press 1919).
  • Brehier, E., The History of Philosophy, vol. 2: The Hellenistic and Roman Age, tr. W. Baskin (Chicago: University of Chicago Press 1958).
  • Copenhaver, B.P., tr., Hermetica (New York: Cambridge University Press 1992).
  • Copleston, F., A History of Philosophy, vol. 1, part 2: Greece and Rome (New York: Image Books 1962).
  • Dillon, J.M., The Middle Platonists (Ithaca: Cornell University Press 1977).
  • Dillon, J.M., Long, A.A., ed., The Question of "Eclecticism": Studies in Later Greek Philosophy (Los Angeles: University of California Press 1988).
  • Dodds, E.R., The Greeks and the Irrational (Los Angeles: University of California Press 1973).
  • Festugiere, A-J, Personal Religion Among the Greeks (Los Angeles: University of California Press 1954).
  • Fowden, G., The Egyptian Hermes: A Historical Approach to the Late Pagan Mind (New York: Cambridge University Press 1986).
  • Guthrie, K.S., The Pythagorean Sourcebook and Library (Grand Rapids: Phanes Press 1988).
  • Henry, P., "The Place of Plotinus in the History of Thought" in Plotinus, The Enneads, tr. S. MacKenna (New York: Penguin Books 1991).
  • Jonas, H., The Gnostic Religion, third edition (Boston: Beacon Press 2001).
  • Layton, B., The Gnostic Scriptures (New York: Doubleday 1987).
  • Lovejoy, A.O., The Great Chain of Being (New York: Harper and Row 1965).
  • Tripolitis, A., The Doctrine of the Soul in the Thought of Plotinus and Origen (New York: Libra 1978).
  • Williams, M.A., Rethinking "Gnosticism": An Argument for Dismantling a Dubious Category (Princeton: Princeton University Press 1996).
  • Witt, R.E., Albinus and the History of Middle Platonism (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press 1937).
  • Zeller, E., Outlines of the History of Greek Philosophy, tr. L.R. Palmer (New York: Meridian Books 1955).

Author Information

Edward Moore
St. Elias School of Orthodox Theology
U. S. A.

Augustine (354—430 C.E.)

augustineSt. Augustine is a fourth century philosopher whose groundbreaking philosophy infused Christian doctrine with Neoplatonism.   He is famous for being an inimitable Catholic theologian and for his agnostic contributions to Western philosophy. He argues that skeptics have no basis for claiming to know that there is no knowledge.  In a proof for existence similar to one later made famous by René Descartes, Augustine says, “[Even] If I am mistaken, I am.” He is the first Western philosopher to promote what has come to be called "the argument by analogy" against solipsism: there are bodies external to mine that behave as I behave and that appear to be nourished as mine is nourished; so, by analogy, I am justified in believing that these bodies have a similar mental life to mine. Augustine believes reason to be a uniquely human cognitive capacity that comprehends deductive truths and logical necessity. Additionally, Augustine adopts a subjective view of time and says that time is nothing in reality but exists only in the human mind’s apprehension of reality. He believes that time is not infinite because God “created” it.

Augustine tries to reconcile his beliefs about freewill, especially the belief that humans are morally responsible for their actions, with his belief that one’s life is predestined. Though initially optimistic about the ability of humans to behave morally, at the end he is pessimistic, and thinks that original sin makes human moral behavior nearly impossible: if it were not for the rare appearance of an accidental and undeserved Grace of God, humans could not be moral. Augustine’s theological discussion of freewill is relevant to a non-religious discussion regardless of the religious-specific language he uses; one can switch Augustine’s “omnipotent being” and “original sin” explanation of predestination for the present day “biology” explanation of predestination; the latter tendency is apparent in modern slogans such as “biology is destiny.”

Table of Contents

  1. Early Years
  2. Manichean and Neoplatonist Period
  3. Conversion and Ordination
  4. Later Years
  5. Anti-Manicheanism and Pelagian Writings
  6. Activity Against Donatism
  7. Development of His Views
  8. Miscellaneous Works

1. Early Years

Augustine is the first ecclesiastical author the whole course of whose development can be clearly traced, as well as the first in whose case we are able to determine the exact period covered by his career, to the very day. He informs us himself that he was born at Thagaste (Tagaste; now Suk Arras), in proconsular Numidia, Nov. 13, 354; he died at Hippo Regius (just south of the modern Bona) Aug. 28, 430. [Both Suk Arras and Bona are in the present Algeria, the first 60 m. W. by s. and the second 65 m. w. of Tunis, the ancient Carthage.] His father Patricius, as a member of the council, belonged to the influential classes of the place; he was, however, in straitened circumstances, and seems to have had nothing remarkable either in mental equipment or in character, but to have been a lively, sensual, hot-tempered person, entirely taken up with his worldly concerns, and unfriendly to Christianity until the close of his life; he became a catechumen shortly before Augustine reached his sixteenth year (369-370). To his mother Monnica (so the manuscripts write her name, not Monica; b. 331, d. 387) Augustine later believed that he owed what lie became. But though she was evidently an honorable, loving, self-sacrificing, and able woman, she was not always the ideal of a Christian mother that tradition has made her appear. Her religion in earlier life has traces of formality and worldliness about it; her ambition for her son seems at first to have had little moral earnestness and she regretted his Manicheanism more than she did his early sensuality. It seems to have been through Ambrose and Augustine that she attained the mature personal piety with which she left the world. Of Augustine as a boy his parents were intensely proud. He received his first education at Thagaste, learning, to read and write, as well as the rudiments of Greek and Latin literature, from teachers who followed the old traditional pagan methods. He seems to have had no systematic instruction in the Christian faith at this period, and though enrolled among the catechumens, apparently was near baptism only when an illness and his own boyish desire made it temporarily probable.

His father, delighted with his son's progress in his studies, sent him first to the neighboring Madaura, and then to Carthage, some two days' journey away. A year's enforced idleness, while the means for this more expensive schooling were being accumulated, proved a time of moral deterioration; but we must be on our guard against forming our conception of Augustine's vicious living from the Confessiones alone. To speak, as Mommsen does, of " frantic dissipation " is to attach too much weight to his own penitent expressions of self-reproach. Looking back as a bishop, he naturally regarded his whole life up to the " conversion " which led to his baptism as a period of wandering from the right way; but not long after this conversion, he judged differently, and found, from one point of view, the turning point of his career in his taking up philosophy -in his nineteenth year. This view of his early life, which may be traced also in the Confessiones, is probably nearer the truth than the popular conception of a youth sunk in all kinds of immorality. When he began the study of rhetoric at Carthage, it is true that (in company with comrades whose ideas of pleasure were probably much more gross than his) he drank of the cup of sensual pleasure. But his ambition prevented him from allowing his dissipations to interfere with his studies. His son Adeodatus was born in the summer of 372, and it was probably the mother of this child whose charms enthralled him soon after his arrival at Carthage about the end of 370. But he remained faithful to her until about 385, and the grief which he felt at parting from her shows what the relation had been. In the view of the civilization of that period, such a monogamous union was distinguished from a formal marriage only by certain legal restrictions, in addition to the informality of its beginning and the possibility of a voluntary dissolution. Even the Church was slow to condemn such unions absolutely, and Monnica seems to have received the child and his mother publicly at Thagaste. In any case Augustine was known to Carthage not as a roysterer but as a quiet honorable student. He was, however, internally dissatisfied with his life. The Hortensius of Cicero, now lost with the exception of a few fragments, made a deep impression on him. To know the truth was henceforth his deepest wish. About the time when the contrast between his ideals and his actual life became intolerable, he learned to conceive of Christianity as the one religion which could lead him to the attainment of his ideal. But his pride of intellect held him back from embracing it earnestly; the Scriptures could not bear comparison with Cicero; he sought for wisdom, not for humble submission to authority.

2. Manichean and Neoplatonist Period

In this frame of mind he was ready to be affected by the so-called "Manichean propaganda" which was then actively carried on in Africa, without apparently being much hindered by the imperial edict against assemblies of the sect. Two things especially attracted him to the Manicheans: they felt at liberty to criticize the Scriptures, particularly the Old Testament, with perfect freedom; and they held chastity and self-denial in honor. The former fitted in with the impression which the Bible had made on Augustine himself; the latter corresponded closely to his mood at the time. The prayer which he tells us he had in his heart then, " Lord, give me chastity and temperance, but not now," may be taken as the formula which represents the attitude of many of the Manichean auditores. Among these Augustine was classed during his nineteenth year; but he went no further, though he held firmly to Manicheanism for nine years, during which he endeavored to convert all his friends, scorned the sacraments of the Church, and held frequent disputations with catholic believers.

Having finished his studies, he returned to Thagaste and began to teach grammar, living in the house of Romanianus, a prominent citizen who had been of much service to him since his father's death, and whom he converted to Manicheanism. Monnica deeply grieved at her son's heresy, forbade him her house, until reassured by a vision that promised his restoration. She comforted herself also by the word of a certain bishop (probably of Thagaste) that "the child of so many tears could not be lost." He seems to have spent little more than a year in Thagaste, when the desire for a wider field, together with the death of a dear friend, moved him to return to Carthage as a teacher of rhetoric.

The next period was a time of diligent study, and produced (about the end of 380) the treatise, long since lost, De pulchro et apto. Meanwhile the hold of Manicheanism on him was loosening. Its feeble cosmology and metaphysics had long since failed to satisfy him, and the astrological superstitions springing from the credulity of its disciples offended his reason. The members of the sect, unwilling to lose him, had great hopes from a meeting with their leader Faustus of Mileve; but when he came to Carthage in the autumn of 382, he too proved disappointing, and Augustine ceased to be at heart a Manichean. He was not yet, however, prepared to put anything in the place of the doctrine he had held, and remained in outward communion with his former associates while he pursued his search for truth. Soon after his Manichean convictions had broken down, he left Carthage for Rome, partly, it would seem, to escape the preponderating influence of his mother on a mind which craved perfect freedom of investigation. Here he was brought more than ever, by obligations of friendship and gratitude, into close association with Manicheans, of whom there were many in Rome, not merely auditores but perfecti or fully initiated members. This did not last long, however, for the prefect Symmachus sent him to Milan, certainly before the beginning of 385, in answer to a request for a professor of rhetoric.

The change of residence completed Augustine's separation from Manicheanism. He listened to the preaching of Ambrose and by it was made acquainted with the allegorical interpretation of the Scriptures and the weakness of the Manichean Biblical criticism, but he was not yet ready to accept catholic Christianity. His mind was still under the influence of the skeptical philosophy of the later Academy. This was the least satisfactory stage in his mental development, though his external circumstances were increasingly favorable. He had his mother again with him now, and shared a house and garden with her and his devoted friends Alypius and Nebridius, who had followed him to Milan; his assured social position is shown also by the fact that, in deference to his mother's entreaties, he was formally betrothed to a woman of suitable station. As a catechumen of the Church, he listened regularly to the sermons of Ambrose. The bishop, though as yet he knew nothing of Augustine's internal struggles, had welcomed him in the friendliest manner both for his own and for Monnica's sake. Yet Augustine was attracted only by Ambrose's eloquence, not by his faith; now he agreed, and now he questioned. Morally his life was perhaps at its lowest point. On his betrothal, he had put away the mother of his son; but neither the grief which he felt at this parting nor regard for his future wife, who was as yet too young for marriage, prevented him from taking a new concubine for the two intervening years. Sensuality, however, began to pall upon him, little as he cared to struggle against it. His idealism was by no means dead; he told Romanian, who came to Milan at this time on business, that he wished he could live altogether in accordance with the dictates of philosophy; and a plan was even made for the foundation of a community retired from the world, which should live entirely for the pursuit of truth. With this project his intention of marriage and his ambition interfered, and Augustine was further off than ever from peace of mind.

In his thirty-first year he was strongly attracted to Neoplatonism by the logic of his development. The idealistic character of this philosophy awoke unbounded enthusiasm, and he was attracted to it also by its exposition of pure intellectual being and of the origin of evil. These doctrines brought him closer to the Church, though he did not yet grasp the full significance of its central doctrine of the personality of Jesus Christ. In his earlier writings he names this acquaintance with the Neoplatonic teaching and its relation to Christianity as the turning-point of his life. The truth, as it may be established by a careful comparison of his earlier and later writings, is that his idealism had been distinctly strengthened by Neoplatonism, which had at the same time revealed his own will, and not a natura altera in him, as the subject of his baser desires. This made the conflict between ideal and actual in his life more unbearable than ever. Yet his sensual desires were still so strong that it seemed impossible for him to break away from them.

3. Conversion and Ordination

Help came in a curious way. A countryman of his, Pontitianus, visited him and told him things which he had never heard about the monastic life and the wonderful conquests over self which had been won under its inspiration. Augustine's pride was touched; that the unlearned should take the kingdom of heaven by violence, while he with all his learning was still held captive by the flesh, seemed unworthy of him. When Pontitianus had gone, with a few vehement words to Alypius, he went hastily with him into the garden to fight out this new problem. Then followed the scene so often described. Overcome by his conflicting emotions he left Alypius and threw himself down under a fig-tree in tears. From a neighboring house came a child's voice repeating again and again the simple words Tolle, lege, " Take up and read." It seemed to him a heavenly indication; he picked up the copy of St. Paul's epistles which he had left where he and Alypius had been sitting, and opened at Romans xiii. When he came to the words, " Let us walk honestly as in the day; not in rioting and drunkenness, not in chambering and wantonness," it seemed to him that a decisive message had been sent to his own soul, and his resolve was taken. Alypius found a word for himself a few lines further, " Him that is weak in the faith receive ye;" and together they went into the house to bring the good news to Monnica. This was at the end of the summer of 386.

Augustine, intent on breaking wholly with his old life, gave up his position, and wrote to Ambrose to ask for baptism. The months which intervened between that summer and the Easter of the following year, at which, according to the early custom, he intended to receive the sacrament, were spent in delightful calm at a country-house, put at his disposal by one of his friends, at Cassisiacum (Casciago, 47 m. n. by w. of Alilan). Here Monnica, Alypius, Adeodatus, and some of his pupils kept him company, and he still lectured on Vergil to them and held philosophic discussions. The whole party returned to Milan before Easter (387), and Augustine, with Alypius and Adeodatus, was baptized. Plans were then made for returning to Africa; but these were upset by the death of Monnica, which took place at Ostia as they were preparing to cross the sea, and has been described by her devoted son in one of the most tender and beautiful passages of the Confessiones. Augustine remained at least another year in Italy, apparently in Rome, living the same quiet life which he had led at Cassisiacum, studying and writing, in company with his countryman Evodius, later bishop of Uzalis. Here, where he had been most closely associated with the Manicheans, his literary warfare with them naturally began; and he was also writing on free will, though this book was only finished at Hippo in 391. In the autumn of 388, passing through Carthage, he returned to Thagaste, a far different man from the Augustine who had left it five years before. Alypius was still with him, and also Adeodatus, who died young, we do not know when or where. Here Augustine and his friends again took up a quiet, though not yet in any sense a monastic, life in common, and pursued their favorite studies. About the beginning of 391, having found a friend in Hippo to help in the foundation of what he calls a monastery, he sold his inheritance, and was ordained presbyter in response to a general demand, though not without misgivings on his own part.

The years which he spent in the presbyterate (391-395) are the last of his formative period. The very earliest works which fall within the time of his episcopate show us the fully developed theologian of whose special teaching we think when we speak of Augustinianism. There is little externally noteworthy in these four years. He took up active work not later than the Easter of 391, when we find him preaching to the candidates for baptism. The plans for a monastic community which had brought him to Hippo were now realized. In a garden given for the purpose by the bishop, Valerius, he founded his monastery, which seems to have been the first in Africa, and is of especial significance because it maintained a clerical school and thus made a connecting link between monastics and the secular clergy. Other details of this period are that he appealed to Aurelius, bishop of Carthage, to suppress the custom of holding banquets and entertainments in the churches, and by 395 had succeeded, through his courageous eloquence, in abolishing it in Hippo; that in 392 a public disputation took place between him and a Manichean presbyter of Hippo, Fortunatus; that his treatise De fide et symbols was prepared to be read before the council held at Hippo October 8, 393; and that after that he was in Carthage for a while, perhaps in connection with the synod held there in 394.

4. Later Years

The intellectual interests of these four years are more easily determined, principally concerned as they are with the Manichean controversy, and producing the treatises De utilitate credendi (391), De duabus animabus contra Manichaos (first half of 392), and Contra Adimantum (394 or 395). His activity against the Donatists also begins in this period, but he is still more occupied with the Manicheans, both from the recollections of his own past and from his increasing knowledge of Scripture, which appears, together with a stronger hold on the Church's teaching, in the works just named, and even more in others of this period, such as his expositions of the Sermon on the Mount and of the Epistles to the Romans and the Galatians. Full as the writings of this epoch are, however, of Biblical phrases and terms,-grace and the law, predestination, vocation, justification, regeneration-a reader who is thoroughly acquainted with Neoplatonism will detect Augustine's avid love of it in a Christian dress in not a few places. He has entered so far into St. Paul's teaching that humanity as a whole appears to him a massa peccati or peccatorum, which, if left to itself, that is, without the grace of God, must inevitably perish. However much we are here reminded of the later Augustine, it is clear that he still held the belief that the free will of man could decide his own destiny. He knew some who saw in Romans ix an unconditional predestination which took away the freedom of the will; but he was still convinced that this was not the Church's teaching. His opinion on this point did not change till after he was a bishop.

The more widely known Augustine became, the more Valerius, the bishop of Hippo, was afraid of losing him on the first vacancy of some neighboring see, and desired to fix him permanently in Hippo by making him coadjutor-bishop,-a desire in which the people ardently concurred. Augustine was strongly opposed to the project, though possibly neither he nor Valerius knew that it might be held to be a violation of the eighth canon of Niema, which forbade in its last clause " two bishops in one city "; and the primate of Numidia, Megalius of Calama, seems to have raised difficulties which sprang at least partly from a personal lack of confidence. But Valerius carried his plan through, and not long before Christmas, 395, Augustine was consecrated by Megalius. It is not known when Valerius died; but it makes little difference, since for the rest of his life he left the administration more and more in the hands of his assistant. Space forbids any attempt to trace events of his later life; and in what remains to be said, biographical interest must be largely our guide. We know a considerable number of events in Augustine's episcopal life which can be surely placed-the so-called third and eighth synods of Carthage in 397 and 403, at which, as at those still to be mentioned, he was certainly present; the disputation with the Manichean Felix at Hippo in 404; the eleventh synod of Carthage in 407; the conference with the Donatists in Carthage, 411; the synod of Mileve, 416; the African general council at Carthage, 418; the journey to Caesarea in Mauretania and the disputation with the Donatist bishop there, 418; another general council in Carthage, 419; and finally the consecration of Eraclius as his assistant in 426.

5. Anti-Manicheanism and Pelagian Writings

His special and direct opposition to Manicheanism did not last a great while after his consecration. About 397 he wrote a tractate Contra epistolam [Manichcet] quam vocant fundamenti; in the De agone christiano, written about the same time, and in the Confessiones, a little later, numerous anti-Manichean expressions occur. After this, however, he only attacked the Manicheans on some special occasion, as when, about 400, on the request of his "brethren," he wrote a detailed rejoinder to Faustus, a Manichean bishop, or made the treatise De natura boni out of his discussions with Felix; a little later, also, the letter of the Manichean Secundinus gave him occasion to write Contra Secundinum, which, in spite of its comparative brevity, he regarded as the best of his writings on this subject. In the succeeding period, he was much more occupied with anti-Donatist polemics, which in their turn were forced to take second place by the emergence of the Pelagian controversy.

It has been thought that Augustine's anti-Pelagian teaching grew out of his conception of the Church and its sacraments as a means of salvation; and attention was called to the fact that before the Pelagian controversy this aspect of the Church had, through the struggle with the Donatists, assumed special importance in his mind. But this conception should be denied. It is quite true that in 395 Augustine's views on sin and grace, freedom and predestination, were not what they afterward came to be. But the new trend was given to them before the time of his anti-Donatist activity, and so before he could have heard anything of Pelagius. What we call Augustinianism was not a reaction against Pelagianism; it would be much truer to say that the latter was a reaction against Augustine's views. He himself names the beginning of his episcopate as the turning-point. Accordingly, in the first thing which he wrote after his consecration, the De diversis gucestionibus ad Simplicianum (396 or 397), we come already upon the new conception. In no other of his writings do we see as plainly the gradual attainment of conviction on any point; as he himself says in the Retractationes, he was laboring for the free choice of the will of man, but the grace of God won the day. So completely was it won, that we might set forth the specifically Augustinian teaching on grace, as against the Pelagians and the Massilians, by a series of quotations taken wholly from this treatise. It is true that much of his later teaching is still undeveloped here; the question of predestination (though the word is used) does not really come up; he is not clear as to the term " election"; and nothing is said of the " gift of perseverance." But what we get on these points later is nothing but the logical consequence of that which is expressed here, and so we have the actual genesis of Augustine's predestinarian teaching under our eyes. It is determined by no reference to the question of infant baptism -- still less by any considerations connected with the conception of the Church. The impulse comes directly from Scripture, with the help, it is true, of those exegetical thoughts which he mentioned earlier as those of others and not his own. To be sure, Paul alone can not explain this doctrine of grace; this is evident from the fact that the very definition of grace is non-Pauline. Grace is for Augustine, both now and later, not the misericordia peccata condonans of the Reformers, as justification is not the alteration of the relation to God accomplished by means of the accipere remissionem. Grace is rather the misericordia which displays itself in the divine inspiratio and justification is justum or pium fieri as a result of this. We may even say that this grace is an interne illuminatio such as a study of Augustine's Neoplatonism enables us easily to understand, which restores the connection with the divine bonum esse. He had long been convinced that " not only the greatest but also the smallest good things can not be, except from him from whom are all good things, that is, from God;" and it might well seem to him to follow from this that faith, which is certainly a good thing, could proceed from the operation of God alone. This explains the idea that grace works like a law of nature, drawing the human will to God with a divine omnipotence. Of course this Neoplatonic coloring must not be exaggerated; it is more consistent with itself in his earlier writings than in the later, and he would never have arrived at his predestinarian teaching without the New Testament. With this knowledge, we are in a position to estimate the force of a difficulty which now confronted Augustine for the first time, but never afterward left him, and which has been present in the Roman Catholic teaching even down to the Councils of Trent and the Vatican. If faith depends upon an action of our own, solicited but not caused by vocation, it can only save a man when, per fidem gratiam accipiens, he becomes one who not merely believes in God but loves him also. But if faith has been already inspired by grace, and if, while the Scripture speaks of justification by faith, it is held (in accordance with the definition of grace) that justification follows upon the infitsio caritatis, -then either the conception of the faith which is God-inspired must pass its fluctuating boundaries and, approach nearer to that of caritas, or the conception of faith which is unconnected with caritas will render the fact of its inspiration unintelligible and justification by faith impossible. Augustine's anti-Pelagian writings set forth this doctrine of grace more clearly in some points, such as the terms " election," " predestination," " the gift of perseverance," and also more logically; but space forbids us to show this here, as the part taken in this controversy by Augustine is so fully detailed elsewhere.

6. Activity Against Donatism

In order to arrive at a decision as to what influence the Donatist controversy had upon Augustine's intellectual development, it is necessary to see how long and how intensely he was concerned with it. We have seen that even before he was a bishop he was defending the catholic Church against the Donatists; and after his consecration he took part directly or indirectly in all the important discussions of the matter, some of which have been already mentioned, and defended the cause of the Church in letters and sermons as well as in his more formal polemical writings. The first of these which belongs to the period of his episcopate, Contra partem Donati, has been lost; about 400 he wrote the two cognate treatises Contra epistulam Parmeniani (the Donatist bishop of Carthage) and De baptismo contra Donatistas. He was considered by the schismatics as their chief antagonist, and was obliged to defend himself against a libelous attack on their part in a rejoinder now lost. From the years 401 and 402 we have the reply to the Donatist bishop of Cirta, Contra epistulam Petiliani, and also the Epistula ad catholicos de unitate ecclesioe. The conflict was now reaching its most acute stage. After the Carthaginian synod of 403 had made preparations for a decisive debate with the Donatists, and the latter had declined to fall in with the plan, the bitterness on both sides increased. Another synod at Carthage the following year decided that the emperor should be asked for penal laws against the Donatists. Honorius granted the request; but the employment of force in matters of belief brought up a new point of discord between the two sides. When these laws were abrogated (409), the plan of a joint conference was tried once more in June, 411, under imperial authority, nearly 300 bishops being present from each side, with Augustine and Aurelius of Carthage as the chief representatives of the Catholic cause. In the following year, the Donatists proving insubordinate, Honorius issued a new and severer edict against them, which proved the beginning of the end for the schism. For these years from 405 to 412 we have twenty-one extant letters of Augustine's bearing on the controversy, and there were eight formal treatises, but four of these are lost. Those which we still have are: Contra Cresconium grammaticum (about 406); De unico baptismio (about 410 or 411), in answer to a work of the same name by Petilian; the brief report of the conference (end of 411); and the Liber contra Donatistas post collationem (probably 412).

7. Development of His Views

The earliest of the extant works against the Donatists present the same views of the Church and its sacraments which Augustine developed later. The principles which he represented in this conflict are merely those which, in a simpler form, had either appeared in the anti-Donatist polemics before his time or had been part of his own earlier belief. What he did was to formulate them with more dogmatic precision,. and to permeate the ordinary controversial theses with his own deep thoughts on unitas, caritas, and inspiratio gratice in the Church, thoughts which again trace their origin back to his Neoplatonic foundations. In the course of the conflict he changed his opinion about the methods to be employed; he had at first been opposed to the employment of force, but later came to the " Compel them to come in " point of view. It may well be doubted, however, if the practical struggle with the schismatics had as much to do with Augustine's development as has been supposed. Far more weight must be attached to the fact that Augustine had become a presbyter and a bishop of the catholic Church, and as such worked continually deeper into the ecclesiastical habit of thought. This was not hard for the son of Monnica and the reverent admirer of Ambrose. His position as a bishop may fairly be said to be the only determining factor in his later views besides his Neoplatonist foundation, his earnest study of the Scripture, and the predestinarian conception of grace which he got from this. Everything else is merely secondary. Thus we find Augustine practically complete by the beginning of his episcopate-about the time when he wrote the Confessiones. It would be too much to say that his development stood still after that; the Biblical and ecclesiastical coloring of his thoughts becomes more and more visible and even vivid; but such development as this is no more significant than the effect of the years seen upon a strong face; in fact, it is even less observable here-for while the characteristic features of his spiritual mind stand out more sharply as time goes on with Augustine, his mental force shows scarcely a sign of age at seventy. His health was uncertain after 386, and his body aged before the time; on Sept. 26, 426, he solemnly designated Eraclius (or Heraclius) as his successor, though without consecrating him bishop, and transferred to him such a portion of his duties as was possible. But his intellectual vigor remained unabated to the end. We see him, as Prosper depicts him in his chronicle, " answering the books of Julian in the very end of his days, while the on-rushing Vandals were at the gates, and gloriously persevering in the defense of Christian grace." In the third month of the siege of Hippo by the barbarian invaders, he fell ill of a fever and, after lingering more than ten days, died Aug. 28, 430. He was able to read on his sick-bed; he had the Penitential Psalms placed upon the wall of his room where he could see them. Meditating upon them, he fulfilled what he had often said before, that even Christians revered for the sanctity of their lives, even presbyters, ought not to leave the world without fitting thoughts of penitence.

8. Miscellaneous Works

Of works not yet mentioned, those written after 395 and named in the Retractationes, may be classified under three heads-exegetical works; minor dogmatic, polemical, and practical treatises; and a separate class containing four more extensive works of special importance. The earliest of the minor treatises is De catechizandis rudibus (about 400), interesting for its connection with the history of catechetical instruction and for many other reasons. A brief enumeration of the others will suffice; they are: De opera monachorum (about 400); De bono conjugali and De sancta virginitate (about 401), both directed against Jovinian's depreciation of virginity; De deviation damonum (between 406 and 411); De fide et operibus (413), a completion of the argument in the De spiritu et litera, useful for a study of the difference between the Augustinian and the Lutheran doctrines of grace; De cura pro mortuis, interesting as showing his attitude toward superstition within the Church; and a few others of less interest. We come now to the four works which have deserved placing in a special category. One is the De doctrina christiana (begun about 397, finished 426), important as giving his theory of scriptural interpretation and homiletics; another is the Enchiridion de fide, spe, et caritate (about 421), noteworthy as an attempt at a systematic collocation of his thoughts. There remain the two doctrinal masterpieces, the De trinitate (probably begun about 400 and finished about 416) and the De civitate Dei (begun about 413, finished about 426). The last-named, beginning with an apologetic purpose, takes on later the form of a history of the City of God from its beginnings.

Author Information

The author of this article is anonymous. The IEP is actively seeking an author who will write a replacement article.

Hindu Philosophy

hindu2The compound “Hindu philosophy” is ambiguous. Minimally it stands for a tradition of Indian philosophical thinking. However, it could be interpreted as designating one comprehensive philosophical doctrine, shared by all Hindu thinkers. The term “Hindu philosophy” is often used loosely in this philosophical or doctrinal sense, but this usage is misleading. There is no single, comprehensive philosophical doctrine shared by all Hindus that distinguishes their view from contrary philosophical views associated with other Indian religious movements such as Buddhism or Jainism on issues of epistemology, metaphysics, logic, ethics or cosmology. Hence, historians of Indian philosophy typically understand the term “Hindu philosophy” as standing for the collection of philosophical views that share a textual connection to certain core Hindu religious texts (the Vedas), and they do not identify “Hindu philosophy” with a particular comprehensive philosophical doctrine.

Hindu philosophy, thus understood, not only includes the philosophical doctrines present in Hindu texts of primary and secondary religious importance, but also the systematic philosophies of the Hindu schools: Nyāya, Vaiśeṣika, Sāṅkhya, Yoga, Pūrvamīmāṃsā and Vedānta. In total, Hindu philosophy has made a sizable contribution to the history of Indian philosophy and its role has been far from static: Hindu philosophy was influenced by Buddhist and Jain philosophies, and in turn Hindu philosophy influenced Buddhist philosophy in India in its later stages. In recent times, Hindu philosophy evolved into what some scholars call "Neo-Hinduism," which can be understood as an Indian response to the perceived sectarianism and scientism of the West. Hindu philosophy thus has a long history, stretching back from the second millennia B.C.E. to the present.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
    1. Defining Hinduism: Salient Features and False Starts
      1. Karma
      2. Polytheism
      3. Purushārthas: dharma, artha, kāma and mokṣa
      4. Varna (Caste)
    2. A Textual Definition of Hinduism and Hindu Philosophy
  2. Stage One: Non-Systematic Hindu Philosophy: The Religious Texts
    1. The Four Vedas
      1. Karma Khaṇḍa or Action Section of the Vedas
      2. Jñana Khaṇḍa or Knowledge Section of the Vedas
    2. Secondary Texts: Smṛti Literature
      1. Itihāsas
      2. Bhagavad Gītā
      3. Purāṇas
      4. Dharmaśāstra
  3. Stage Two: Systematic Hindu Philosophy: the Darśanas
    1. Nyāya
    2. Vaiśeṣika
    3. Sāṅkhya
    4. Yoga
    5. Pūrvamīmāṃsā
    6. Vedānta
      1. Bhedābheda
      2. Commonalities of the Three Famous Commentaries
      3. Advaita
      4. Viśiṣṭādvaita
      5. Dvaita
    7. Classical Hindu Philosophy in the Context of Indian Philosophy
  4. Stage Three: Neo-Hinduism
  5. Conclusion: the Status of Hindu Philosophy
  6. References and Further Readings
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Introduction

“Hinduism” is a term used to designate a body of religious and philosophical beliefs indigenous to the Indian subcontinent. Hinduism is one of the world’s oldest religious traditions, and it is founded upon what is often regarded as the oldest surviving text of humanity: the Vedas. It is a religion practiced the world over. Countries with Hindu majorities include Bali, India, Mauritius and Nepal, though countries in Asia, Africa, Europe and the Americas have sizable minorities of practicing Hindus.

For historical and doctrinal reasons, some modern Indologists have adopted the convention of distinguishing between traditional Hinduism and “Neo-Hinduism” (cf. Hacker; Halbfass, India and Europe). Against this distinction, “Hinduism” is often reserved for some traditional philosophical and religious beliefs indigenous to the Indian subcontinent, and “Neo-Hinduism” is reserved for a modern set of religious and philosophical beliefs articulated by Indians who defined their religious views in contrast to a perceived Western preoccupation with scientism and sectarianism. For many Western educated individuals in the world today (particularly those who count themselves as “Hindus”), the philosophy captured under the term “Neo-Hinduism” designates their religious and philosophical belief set. While Neo-Hinduism is no doubt a part of the Hindu philosophical tradition, it constitutes a distinct development within the tradition. Here the terms “Neo-Hindu” and “Neo-Hinduism” will be used to single out this recent development of Hindu thought. “Hindu” and “Hinduism” will be used to designate any portion of the tradition. The label “Hindu philosophy” will be reserved for the philosophical elements of Hinduism.

The history of Hindu philosophy can be divided roughly into three, largely overlapping stages:

  1. Non-Systematic Hindu Philosophy, found in the Vedas and secondary religious texts (beginning in the 2nd millennia B.C.E.)
  2. Systematic Hindu Philosophy (beginning in the 1st millennia B.C.E.)
  3. Neo-Hindu Philosophy (beginning in the 19th century C.E.)

Hindu philosophy is difficult to narrow down to a definite doctrine because Hinduism itself, as a religion, resists identification with any well worked out doctrine. This may not be so surprising when we consider that the term “Hinduism” itself is not in traditional, pre-colonial Hindu literature. Prior to the modern period of history, authors that we think of as Hindus did not identify themselves by that title. The term itself is not rooted in any Indian language, but likely derives from the Persian term “sindhu,” cognate with the Latin “Indus,” used to refer to inhabitants of the Indian subcontinent (cf. Monier-Williams p.1298). Its historical usage is thus an umbrella term that identifies many related religious and philosophical traditions that are not clearly part of another Indian tradition, such as Buddhism and Jainism.

Owing to the geographical proximity of the views grouped under the term “Hinduism” we might expect that such views have some comprehensive doctrinal similarities. However, many of the ideas and practices commonly associated with Hinduism can be found in adjacent Indian religio-philosophical traditions, such as Buddhism and Jainism. Moreover, some of them are not common to all Hindu thinkers. The rich diversity of views within the Hindu tradition that overlap with non-Hindu views makes identifying “Hinduism” on the basis of a shared, comprehensive doctrine difficult if not impossible.

a. Defining Hinduism: Salient Features and False Starts

i. Karma

A common thesis associated with Hinduism is the view that events in a person’s life are determined by karma. The term literally means “action,” but in this context it denotes the moral, psychological spiritual and physical causal consequences of morally significant past choices. If it were the case that a belief in karma is common to all Hindu philosophies, and only Hindu philosophies, then we would have a clear doctrinal criterion for identifying Hinduism. This approach is unsuccessful because a belief in karma is common to many of India’s religious traditions—including Buddhism and Jainism. Moreover, it is not evident that it is embraced by all sources that we consider Hindu. For instance, the doctrine of karma seems to be absent from much of the Vedas. Karma is not a sufficient criterion of Hinduism, and it likely is not a necessary condition either.

ii. Polytheism

Polytheism, or the worship of many deities, is often identified as a distinctive feature of Hinduism. However, it is not true that all Hindus are polytheists. Indeed, many Hindus belong to sectarian traditions (such as Vaiṣṇavism, or Śaivism) that specify that only one deity (Viṣṇu, in the first case, or Śiva, in the second), or a very small set of deities, are genuine Gods, and subordinate the rest of the pantheon associated with Hinduism to the status of exalted beings. We could identify Hinduism as the set of religious views that recognize the divinity or exalted status of a core set of Indic deities, but this too would not provide a way to separate Hinduism from Buddhism and Jainism. Many “Hindu” deities, such as Brahmā (the Creator God), are recognized and treated as exalted beings and deities in the Buddhist Pāli Canon (cf. Majjhima Nikāya II.130; Saṃyutta Nikāya I.421-23). Likewise, the popular Hindu deity Kṛṣṇa is treated in the early Jain tradition as a Jain Ford Maker, and a tradition of worshiping the Goddess Lakṣmī (a goddess revered by Hindus as the consort of Viṣṇu) continues amongst Jains today (see Dundas pp. 98, 183). Belief in certain deities might constitute a necessary condition of Hinduism, but it is not a sufficient criterion.

iii. Puruṣārthas : dharma, artha, kāma and mokṣa

Hinduism might be identified with a core set of values, commonly known in Hindu literature as the puruṣārthas , or ends of persons. The puruṣārthas are a set of four values: dharma, artha, kāma and mokṣa. “Dharma” in the Puruṣārtha scheme and throughout much of Hindu literature stands for the ethical or moral (in action, or in character, hence it is often translated as “duty”), “artha” for economic wealth, “kāma” for pleasure, and “mokṣa” for soteriological liberation from rebirth and imperfection. Hinduism, one might argue, is any religious view from the Indian subcontinent that recognizes that human beings ought to maximize the puruṣārthas at the appropriate time and in the appropriate ways. This approach will not do, for not all views that we consider Hindu recognize the validity of all of these values. While many of the systematic Hindu philosophical schools seem to be critical of kāma, understood as sensual pleasure, the early stage of one Hindu philosophical school—Pūrvamīmāṃsā—does not recognize the idea that there is anything like liberation as a possible end for individuals.

The puruṣārthas are important for any study of Indian thought, however, for they constitute the value-theoretic backdrop against which Indian thinkers articulated their views: typically, most all Indian philosophers recognized the validity of all four values, though some, like the Materialists (Cārvāka) are on record as holding that kāma or sensual pleasure is the only dharma or morality (Guṇaratna p.276), and that there is no such thing as liberation. Others such as the early Pūrvamīmāṃsā ignore the idea of personal liberation but emphasizes the importance of dharma. As all Hindu philosophical schools appear to recognize something that might count as “dharma” or morality, we might attempt to understand Hinduism in terms of its allegiance to a particular moral theory. This attempt to define Hinduism in terms of a simple doctrine fails, for some of what passes for dharma (ethics, morality or duty) in the context of particular schools of Hindu philosophical thought share much with non-Hindu, but Indian schools of thought. This is particularly apparent in the case of the Hindu philosophical school of Yoga, whose moral theory shares much with Jainism, and with Buddhist Mahāyāna thought. Also, there is sufficient variation amongst the schools of Hindu philosophy on moral matters that makes defining Hindu philosophy solely on the basis of a shared moral doctrine impossible. If there is a core moral theory common to all Hindu schools, it is likely to be so thin that it will also be found as a component of other Indian religions. Thus, an ethical theory might be a necessary criterion of Hinduism, but it is insufficient.

iv. Varna (Caste)

Finally, one might attempt to identify Hinduism with the institution of a caste system that carves society into a specified set of classes whose natures dispose them and obligate them to certain occupations in life. More specifically, one might argue that Hinduism is any belief system wedded to the idea that any well ordered society is composed of four castes: Brahmins (priestly or scholarly caste), Kṣatriya (marshal or royal caste), Vaiśyas (merchant caste) and Sūdras (labor caste).
This approach to defining Hinduism is essentially a rehabilitation of the idea that some core moral doctrine cements Hinduism together. There are two problems with this approach that renders it unhelpful to identifying Hinduism. First, anyone familiar with Indian society will know that caste (“varna,” or more commonly “jāti”) is an Indian phenomenon that is not restricted to Hindu sections of society. One might argue that the approving use of the term “Brahmin” in Buddhist and Jain texts shows that even these socially critical movements were comfortable with a caste structured society provided that obligations and privileges accorded to the various castes were justly distributed (cf. Dhammapada ch. XXVI; cf. Sūtrakṛtānga I.xii.11-21). Secondly, and more importantly, it is not clear that caste is philosophically important to many schools that are conventionally understood under the heading of “Hindu philosophy.” Some schools, such as Yoga, appear to be implicitly critical of life in conventional society guided by the values of social and ecological domination, while some schools, such as Advaita Vedānta, are openly critical of the idea that caste morality has any relevance to a spiritually serious aspirant.

b. A Textual Definition of Hinduism and Hindu Philosophy

Because the term “Hinduism” has no roots in the self-conceptualization of people that we in retrospect label as “Hindus,” we are unlikely to find anything very significant in the way of philosophical doctrine that is essential to Hinduism. Yet, the term continues to be useful because it centers on a stance that separates Hindu thinkers from Buddhist, Jain, or Sikh thinkers. The stance in question is openness to the provisional validity of a core set of Hindu texts. At the center of the canon of Hindu texts is the Vedas, followed by a large body of literature of secondary religious importance, which largely derive their legitimacy from Vedic thought. Non-systematic Hindu philosophy is comprised of the philosophical elements of the primary and secondary bodies of canonical Hindu texts, while the systematic Hindu philosophies, which also adopt the congenial disposition towards the Vedas, find their definitive expressions in formal philosophical texts authored by professional philosophers. Finally, Neo-Hindu philosophy of late likewise adopts a positive disposition to the Vedas, and hence constitutes the latest offering in the history of Hindu philosophy.

2. Stage One: Non-Systematic Hindu Philosophy: The Religious Texts

a. The Four Vedas

The Vedas are a large corpus, originally committed to memory and transmitted orally from teacher to student. The term “veda” means "knowledge" or "wisdom" and embodies what was likely regarded by its original attendants as the sum-total of the knowledge of their people. On the basis of linguistic variations in the corpus, contemporary scholars are of the opinion that the Vedas were composed at various points during approximately a 900 year span that can be no later than 1500 B.C.E. to 600 B.C.E.. The Vedas are composed in an Indo-European language that is loosely referred to as Sanskrit, but much of it is in an ancient precursor to Sanskrit, more properly called Vedic.

The Vedic corpus is comprised of four works each called “Vedas.” The four Vedas are Ṛg Veda, Sāma Veda, Yajur Veda and Atharva Veda, respectively. Each of the four Vedas is edited into four distinct sections: Mantras, Brāhmanas, Āraṇyakas, and Upaniṣads.

i. Karma Khaṇḍa or Action Section of the Vedas

The main portion of the Veda (which the term “Veda” most properly refers to) consists of mantras, or sacred chants and incantations. A section called the Brāhmanas, which contains ritual instruction, and speculative discussions on the meaning of Vedic rituals, follows this. These first two portions comprise what is often called the karma khaṇḍa or “action portion” of the Vedas, or alternatively, the Pūrvamīmāṃsā ("former inquiry"). (The philosophical school of Pūrvamīmāṃsā takes its name from its focus on the early part of the Vedas.)

Many of the hymns of the karma khaṇḍa ask for special favors from deities, and emphasize the worldly rewards of artha (economic prosperity) and kāma (sensual pleasure) that come from propitiating gods through prescribed sacrifices. However, the earlier portion of the Vedas is not entirely devoid of lofty or philosophical significance. Many of the mantras resurface in the latter portion of the Vedas as dense expressions of metaphysical theses. Moreover, many portions of the karma khaṇḍa elaborate the significance of the various Vedic deities, which surpass the role that could be attributed to them in a polytheistic context. Instead, what one finds frequently is the elevation of a single deity to the level of the cosmic soul (for example, see the Śrī Rudra).

A recurrent cosmological and ethical vision appears to emerge in the karma khaṇḍa. This is the idea that the universe is a closed ethical system, supported by a system of reciprocal sacrifice and obligation. In this context, the karma khaṇḍa promotes the practice of animal sacrifices to the gods, to ensure that conditions on earth are livable and fruitful for all of its inhabitants. A related doctrine that begins to emerge in portions of the karma khaṇḍa is the four-fold caste system that sets out strict obligations for all to fulfill, along with the idea that the caste-social order is divinely ordained. This is most clearly related in the Puruṣa Sūkta, a section of mantras from the Ṛg Veda. According to the Puruṣa Sūkta, the universe, as we know it, is a result of the self-sacrifice of a Cosmic Person (an ultimate God, later identified with Viṣṇu or Śiva, depending upon sectarian contexts). Upon being bound and sacrificed by the gods, the various portions of the Cosmic Person become the various castes: the head becomes the Brahmins, the arms become the Ksatriya caste, the thighs become the Vaiśya caste, and the feet become the Sūdra caste. While the caste system may be a pervasively Indian phenomenon, the idea that the caste system is divinely ordained appears to be found in Hindu philosophies in proportion to the weight they give to the authority of the karma khaṇḍa.

ii. Jñana Khaṇḍa or Knowledge Section of the Vedas

The karma khaṇḍa is followed by the Āraṇyakas, or forest books, which for the most part eschew rituals, and are far more speculative. After the Āraṇyakas come the section of the Vedas known as the “ Upaniṣads,” which consist of a dialogue between a teacher and student on metaphysical, axiological and cosmological issues. Whereas the goal of the early portion of the Vedas is action, the goal of the latter portion of the Vedas is jñāna (knowledge) of Brahman (a neuter term for the Ultimate, depicted in the Upaniṣads as the ultimate God). Further, the Upaniṣads identify Brahman with Ātma (Self) and suggest that knowing this entity will save one from all sorrow (cf. Muṇdaka Upaniṣad 7) and result in liberation. Brahman or Ātma is additionally presented as the omniscient, omnipotent and omnipresent entity hidden from plain view, but known through philosophical speculation that is driven by dissatisfaction with earthly rewards. This latter part of the Vedas is often referred to as the uttara mīmāṃsā ("higher inquiry"), or the vedānta, which means "end of the Vedas." Alternatively, it is known as the jñāna khaṇḍa, or "knowledge portion" of the Vedas. (The Hindu schools known as Vedānta take their name from their focus on this portion of the Vedas). The sustained theme of the uttara mīmāṃsā is that the cosmos as we know it is the result of the causal efficacy of Brahman, or Ātma, that the results of works are ephemeral, and that knowledge of reality brings everlasting reward. The uttara mīmāṃsā is characterized by a pervasive dissatisfaction with ritual (cf. Muṇdaka Upaniṣad I.ii.10).

The specific relationship between the individual and Brahman, or Ātma, is a matter of controversy amongst commentators on the latter portions of the Vedas. Four major commentarial schools evolved to interpret the import of the later portions of the Vedas. This confirms the suspicion that the actual position of the Upaniṣads is less than clear, or at least debatable. (See Vedānta.)

b. Secondary Texts: Smṛti Literature

On many traditional Hindu accounts (specifically the account found in the Pūrvamīmāṃsā and Vedānta schools), the Vedas are regarded as “śruti”, "heard" or revealed texts, and are contrasted with smṛti or remembered texts. The smṛti texts are far more numerous, but purport to be based upon the learning of the Vedas. Unlike the Vedas, the smṛtis were traditionally regarded as appropriate for general consumption, while the Vedas were regarded as the sole preserve of the high castes. The smṛti literature, as a rule, was originally authored in Sanskrit. Over time, however, translations into vernacular languages became popular, and additional texts were authored in vernaculars.

The tradition of smṛti literature stretches back to the end of the Vedic period, and in some ways is still very much alive today. The smṛti texts can all be read as attempting to unify the seemingly divergent goals of the action section of the Vedas (being morality, or dharma) and the knowledge section of the Vedas (being liberation or mokṣa). The overall strategy offered in the various smṛti texts is to affirm a moral scheme known traditionally as varna āśrama dharma, or the morality of caste (varna) and station in life (āśrama). This scheme reconciles the demands of dharma and mokṣa, as well as artha and kāma, by apportioning different stages of life to the pursuit of different ends. At the end of childhood, and before the beginning of adolescence, an individual is typically expected to be a celibate student (brahmacarya), and learn one caste’s ways. Then at an appropriate age they are to marry and become a householder (gṛhastha). During this stage an individual is permitted and expected to pursue the ends of kāma or sensual pleasure through married life and artha or economic prosperity through caste occupations. After raising a family, a couple is to retire to the forest and become forest dwellers (vānaprastha), to facilitate their transition from a life focused on kāma and artha to a life geared towards liberation. Finally, individuals give up all possessions, renounce society and become a ascetic (sannyāsa) at which point they are to focus solely on mokṣa or spiritual liberation.

There are three prominent varieties of smṛti literature that are important to the study of Hindu philosophy. Though they for the most part express and extol the doctrine of varna āśrama dharma, they are composed in different styles, and with different audiences in mind.

i. Itihāsas

The best known of the smṛti literature are the great Hindu epics, such as the Mahābhārata and Rāmāyana. The focal plot of the Mahābhārata is a fratricidal war between the children of two princes. The deity Kṛṣṇa figures prominently in this epic, as a mutual cousin of both warring factions, though he is not the protagonist. The Rāmāyana is an account of the life story of the crown prince Rāma up until he vanquishes the tyrant King Rāvana and successfully rescues his wife and the crown princess Sītā from Rāvana’s grips. Both Kṛṣṇa and Rāma are traditionally regarded as human incarnations of Viṣṇu. Both the Mahābhārata and Rāmāyana are grouped under the heading of itihāsa (‘thus spoken’) literature. The focal events of the two epics likely occurred between 1000 B.C.E. and 700 A.D. (Thapar p. 31) though the epics themselves appear to have gone through a long process of revision and evolution before their final Sanskrit versions appear on the scene in the first two centuries of the common era.

Itihāsas, though recorded in the form of a narrative, are littered with philosophical discussions on cosmology, and ethics. The most philosophically famous portion of the itihāsa literature is the Bhagavad Gītā. The Bhagavad Gītā forms a portion of the Mahābhārata, but owing to its importance in the tradition it is often regarded as a stand-alone text.

ii. Bhagavad Gītā

The Bhagavad Gītā consists of a discourse given by Kṛṣṇa on the eve of the battle of the fratricidal war of the Mahābhārata to his cousin Arjuna, who becomes despondent at the thought of engaging in a war whose main aim is resting control over the throne, at the expense of the destruction of his family. Kṛṣṇa exhorts Arjuna to do his duty as a Ksatriya and fight the war that he has been charged with (Bhagavad Gītā 2:31). For “[b]etter is one’s own duty, though ill done, than the duty of another well done….” (Bhagavad Gītā 18:47; cf. Manu X. 97). In keeping with the general theme of the smṛti literature, Kṛṣṇa focuses on reconciling the goal of mokṣa with that of dharma. Kṛṣṇa’s first solution to the problem of the conflict of dharma and mokṣa involves doing one’s duty with a strong deontological consciousness, which attends to duty for duty’s sake, and not for its rewards. This deontological attitude not only perfects moral action, on Kṛṣṇa’s account, but it also constitutes true renunciation, which is a prerequisite to mokṣa. Kṛṣṇa calls the deontological renunciation of rewards of dutiful action karma yoga, or the discipline (yoga) of action (karma) (Bhagavad Gītā ch.3). This is not the only type of yoga that Kṛṣṇa prescribes. He also propounds what he identifies as distinct yogas (Bhagavad Gītā chs. 4-11) that might be grouped under the heading of jñāna yoga, or the discipline (yoga) of knowledge (jñāna), whereby one develops a detached attitude towards the fruits of works through knowledge of the excellences and unchanging nature of the transcendent (sometimes spoken of as “Brahman” in this text), and the ephemeral and temporary nature of worldly accomplishments. To this end, Kṛṣṇa calls upon the philosophy of Sāṅkhya and Yoga, as well as the philosophical concepts of the Upaniṣads to explicate the nature of the changing and the transcendent. Finally, Kṛṣṇa also prescribes what he calls bhakti yoga or the “discipline (yoga) of devotion (bhakti)” (Bhagavad Gītā chs. 12-18). Whereas in karma yoga, one merely gives up fruits of actions, in bhakti yoga one offers the fruits of one’s actions to God. Whereas in jñāna yoga one pursues knowledge for its own sake, in bhakti yoga one pursues knowledge for the sake of a loving relationship with the Ultimate. Kṛṣṇa appears to hold that any of the ways that he prescribes will result in liberation for all three varieties of yogas will ensure that the obstacle to liberation—attachment to fruits of actions—is over come.

iii. Purāṇas

Purāna” means history and is the term applied to a group of texts that share a few features: (a) they typically provide a detailed history of the origin of the various gods and the Universe, and (b) they are written in praise of the exploits of a particular deity. Unlike the itihāsas, the Purāṇas are not restricted to incarnations of deities, but describe the activities of the deities, including their incarnations. The Purāṇa literature comes down to us from a time that post dates the composition of the Vedas, though their precise dates of composition are not known (cf. Thapar p.29). There are many Purāṇas, though the most famous is likely the Bhāgavata Purāṇa.

The Bhāgavata Purāṇa is distinguished amongst Purāṇas for being regarded by Gaudiya Vaiṣṇavism, founded by the medieval Bengali saint Caitanya, as the ultimate revelation on all doctrinal matters. This tradition has come into prominence in recent times in the form of the International Society for Kṛṣṇa Consciousness, commonly known as the Hare Kṛṣṇa movement. According to the Bhāgavata Purāṇa, the Ultimate (Brahman) is both identical with and distinct from creation: on this account, Brahman converts itself into the universe but maintains a distinct identity all the same. The Bhāgavata Purāṇa also identifies Viṣṇu with Brahman, and holds that bhakti (devotion) is the chief means of attaining liberation, which consists in the personal absorption of the individual (jīva) in Brahman. The Bhāgavata Purāṇa thus presents one of the famous and enduring theistic expressions of the Bhedābheda philosophy. In the way of ethics, the Bhāgavata Purāṇa strays little from the Varna āśrama dharma found in most smṛti literature (Bhāgavata Purāṇa I.ii.9-12), though it advocates what it calls “bhāgavata dharma” (bhāgavata ethic) which is a combination of the karma yoga and bhakti yoga of the Gītā supplemented with an emphasis on living the life characteristic of a devotee of Kṛṣṇa as described in the Bhāgavata Purāṇa (XI.iii.23-31).

iv. Dharmaśāstra

The term “dharmaśāstra” literally means treaties or science (śāstra) of dharma. The term refers to a corpus of literature clearly authored by Brahmins with the aim of reinforcing a particular conception of Varna āśrama dharma: a moral theory that critics will note ensures that Brahmins are allotted a privileged or crowning position in the caste scheme. The dharmaśāstras contain many features of other smṛti literature that make them philosophically interesting.

Like the Purāṇa literature, many of the dharmaśāstras provide accounts of the origins of the universe, and sometimes they delve into the question of the means to liberation. Their dominant concern however is to prescribe the specific duties and privileges of each caste. After attending to the political question of the proper ordering of society, the dharmaśāstras typically focus on the matter of prayaścitta, or ritual expiation (see Kane vol.4 ch.1 pp. 1-40).

The idea of ritual expiation can be understood as a procedure concerned with alleviating ritual impurity. However, it also has clear moral implications: prayaścittas are prescribed for every manner of offence, and if an agent undertakes the appropriate prayaścitta, they can atone for their moral transgressions. A prayaścitta can take the form of a ritual, an act of charity, or corporal punishment. The idea that one can ritually atone for moral transgressions is unique to the dharmaśāstras, and related texts in the history of Hindu philosophy.

3. Stage Two: Systematic Hindu Philosophy: the Darśanas

Core Hindu canonical texts—the Vedas—form the textual backdrop against which many of the systematic Hindu philosophies are articulated. However, they do not exhaust the import of Hindu philosophy for two main reasons. First, the Vedas are not composed with the intention of being systematic treaties on philosophical issues. They leave many issues of philosophy relatively untouched. Secondly, the core Hindu canonical texts are not canonical in the same way for all Hindus. By and large, those we tend to regard as Hindu accord some type of provisional authority to both the Vedas, and the secondary Vedic literature. However, the authority accorded is something that Hindu thinkers have disagreed upon. Some of the foundational works in systematic Hindu philosophy do not explicitly mention the Vedas (for example, the Sāṅkhya Kārikā), leaving the impression that these schools were tolerant of the authority of the Vedas, but not philosophically wedded to it in any deep sense.

The term “darśana” in Sanskrit translates as "vision" and is conventionally regarded as designating what we are inclined to look upon as systematic philosophical views. The history of Indian philosophy is replete with darśanas. The number of darśanas to be found in the history of Indian philosophy depends largely on the organizational question of how one is to enumerate darśanas: how much difference between expressions of philosophical views can be tolerated before we are inclined to count texts as expressing distinct darśanas? The question seems particularly pertinent in cases like Buddhist and Jain philosophy, which have all had rich philosophical histories. The issue is relatively easier to settle in the context of Hindu philosophy, for a convention has developed over the centuries to count systematic Hindu philosophy as being comprised of six (āstika, or Veda recognizing) darśanas. The six darśanas are: Nyāya, Vaiśeṣika, Sāṅkhya, Yoga, Pūrvamīmāṃsā, and Vedānta.

As a rule, systematic Indian philosophy (Hinduism, Jainism and Buddhism) was recorded in Sanskrit, the pan-Indian language of scholarship, after the end of the Vedic period. While scholars are confident about the approximate dates that the texts of systematic Indian philosophy handed down to us were written (cf. Potter, “Bibliography,” Encyclopaedia of Indian Philosophies, vol.1) scholars are not in many cases as confident about the age of the schools themselves. Moreover, most of the schools of Hindu philosophy have existed side by side. Thus, the order of explication of the systematic schools of Hindu philosophy follows the conventional order of explication and not any particular historical order.

a. Nyāya

The term "nyāya" traditionally had the meaning "formal reasoning," though in later times it also came to be used for reasoning in general, and by extension, the legal reasoning of traditional Indian law courts. Opponents of the Nyāya school of philosophy frequently reduce it to the status of an arm of Hindu philosophy devoted to questions of logic and rhetoric. While reasoning is very important to Nyāya, this school also had important things to say on the topic of epistemology, theology and metaphysics, rendering it a comprehensive and autonomous school of Indian philosophy.

The Nyāya school of Hindu philosophy has had a long and illustrious history. The founder of this school is the sage Gautama (2nd cent. C.E.)—not to be confused with the Buddha, who on many accounts had the name “Gautama” as well. Nyāya went through at least two stages in the history of Indian philosophy. At an earlier, purer stage, proponents of Nyāya sought to elaborate a philosophy that was distinct from contrary darśanas. At a later stage, some Nyāya and Vaiśeṣika authors (such as Śaṅkara-Misra, 15th cent. C.E.) became increasingly syncretistic and viewed their two schools as sister darśanas. As well, at the latter stages of the Nyāya tradition, the philosopher Gaṅgeśa (14th cent. C.E.) narrowed the focus to the epistemological issues discussed by the earlier authors, while leaving off metaphysical matters and so initiated a new school, which came to be known as Navya Nyāya, or “New” Nyāya. Our focus will be mainly on classical, non-syncretic, Nyāya.

According to the first verse of the Nyāya-Sūtra, the Nyāya school is concerned with shedding light on sixteen topics: pramāna (epistemology), prameya (ontology), saṃśaya (doubt), prayojana (axiology, or “purpose”), dṛṣṭānta(paradigm cases that establish a rule), Siddhānta (established doctrine), avayava (premise of a syllogism), tarka (reductio ad absurdum), nirnaya (certain beliefs gained through epistemically respectable means), vāda (appropriately conducted discussion), jalpa (sophistic debates aimed at beating the opponent, and not at establishing the truth), vitaṇḍa(a debate characterized by one party’s disinterest in establishing a positive view, and solely with refutation of the opponent’s view), hetvābhāsa (persuasive but fallacious arguments), chala (unfair attempt to contradict a statement by equivocating its meaning), jāti (an unfair reply to an argument based on a false analogy), and nigrahasthāna (ground for defeat in a debate) (Nyāya-Sūtra and Vātsyāyana’s Bhāṣya I.1.1-20).

With respect to the question of epistemology, the Nyāya-Sūtra recognizes four avenues of knowledge: these are perception, inference, analogy, and verbal testimony of reliable persons. Perception arises when the senses make contact with the object of perception. Inference comes in three varieties: pūrvavat (a priori), śeṣavat (a posteriori) and sāmanyatodṛṣṭa (common sense) (Nyāya-Sūtra I.1.3–7).

The Nyāya's acceptance of both arguments from analogy and testimony as means of knowledge, allows it to accomplish two theological goals. First, it allows Nyāya to claim that the Veda’s are valid owing to the reliability of their transmitters (Nyāya-Sūtra II.1.68). Secondly, the acceptance of arguments from analogy allows the Nyāya philosophers to forward a natural theology based on analogical reasoning. Specifically, the Nyāya tradition is famous for the argument that God’s existence can be known for (a) all created things resemble artifacts, and (b) just as every artifact has a creator, so too must all of creation have a creator (Udayanācārya and Haridāsa Nyāyālaṃkāra I.3-4).

The metaphysics that pervades the Nyāya texts is both realistic and pluralistic. On the Nyāya view the plurality of reasonably believed things exist and have an identity independently of their contingent relationship with other objects. This applies as much to mundane objects, as it does to the self, and God. The ontological model that appears to pervade Nyāya metaphysical thinking is that of atomism, the view that reality is composed of indecomposable simples (cf. Nyāya-Sūtra IV.2.4.16).

Nyāya’s treatment of logical and rhetorical issues, particularly in the Nyāya Sūtra, consists in an extended inventory acceptable and unacceptable argumentation. Nyāya is often depicted as primarily concerned with logic, but it is more accurately thought of as being concerned with argumentation.

b. Vaiśeṣika

The Vaiśeṣika system was founded by the ascetic, Kaṇāḍa (1st cent. C.E.). His name translates literally as “atom-eater.” On some accounts Kaṇāḍa gained this name because of the pronounced ontological atomism of his philosophy (Vaiśeṣika Sūtra VII.1.8), or because he restricted his diet to grains picked from the field. If the Nyāya system can be characterized as being predominantly concerned with matters of argumentation, the Vaiśeṣika system can be characterized as overwhelmingly concerned with metaphysical questions. Like Nyāya, Vaiśeṣika in its later stages turned into a syncretic movement, wedded to the Nyāya system. Here the focus will be primarily on the early Vaiśeṣika system, with the help of some latter day commentaries.

Kaṇāḍa’s Vaiśeṣika Sūtra’s opening verses are both dense and very revealing about the scope of the system. The opening verse states that the topic of the text is the elaboration of dharma (ethics or morality). According to the second verse, dharma is that which results not only in abhyudaya but also the Supreme Good (niḥreyasa), commonly known as mokṣa (liberation) in Indian philosophy (Vaiśeṣika Sūtra I.1.1-2). The term “abhyudaya” designates the values extolled in the early, action portion of the Vedas, such as artha (economic prosperity) and kāma (sensual pleasure). From the second verse it thus appears that the Vaiśeṣika system regards morality as providing the way for the remaining puruṣārthas . A reading of the obscure third verse provided by the latter day philosopher Śaṅkara-Misra (15th cent. C.E.) states that the validity of the Vedas rests on the fact that it is an explication of dharma. (Misra’s alternative explanation is that the phrase can be read as asserting that the validity of the Vedas derives from the authority of its author, God—this is a syncretistic reading of the Vaiśeṣika Sūtra, influenced by Nyāya philosophy.) (Śaṅkara-Misra’s Vaiśeṣika Sūtra Bhāṣya I.1.2, p.7).

From the densely worded fourth verse, it appears that the Vaiśeṣika system regards itself as an explication of dharma. The Vaiśeṣika system holds that the elaboration or knowledge of the particular expression of dharma (which is the Vaiśeṣika system) consists of knowledge of six categories: substance (dravya), attribute (guṇa), action (karma), genus (sāmānya), particularity (viśeṣa), and the relationship of inherence between attributes and their substances (samavāya) (Vaiśeṣika Sūtra I.1.4).

The dense fourth verse of the Vaiśeṣika Sūtra gives expression to a thorough going metaphysical realism. On the Vaiśeṣika account, universals (sāmānya) as well as particularity (viśeṣa) are realities, and these have a distinct reality from substances, attributes, actions, and the relation of inherence, which all have their own irreducible reality.

The metaphysical import of the fourth verse potentially obscures the fact that the Vaiśeṣika system sets itself the task of elaborating dharma. Given the weight that the Vaiśeṣika Sūtra gives to ontological matters, it is inviting to treat its insistence that it seeks to elaborate dharma as quite irrelevant to its overall concern. However, subsequent authors in the Vaiśeṣika tradition have drawn attention to the significance of dharma to the overall system.

Śaṅkara-Misra suggests that dharma understood in its particular presentation in the Vaiśeṣika system is a kind of sagely forbearance or withdrawal from the world (Śaṅkara-Misra’s Vaiśeṣika Sūtra Bhāṣya I.1.4. p.12). In a similar vein, another commentator, Chandrakānta (19th cent. C.E.), states:

Dharma presents two aspects, that is under the characteristic of Pravṛitti or worldly activity, and the characteristic of Nivṛitti or withdrawal from worldly activity. Of these, Dharma characterized by Nivṛitti, brings forth tattva–jñana or knowledge of truths, by means of removal of sins and other blemishes. (Chandrakānta p.15.)

Thus the view of the commentators appears to be that the Vaiśeṣika system, which yields “knowledge of truths,” “knowledge of the categories,” or “knowledge of the essences” (cf. Śaṅkara-Misra, p.5) is a moral virtue of the person who is initiated into the system—that is, a “particular dharma” of that person. Hence, in elaborating the nature of reality, the Vaiśeṣika system seeks to extinguish the ignorance that obstructs the effects of dharma, and it thus also constitutes a moral virtue of the proponent of the Vaiśeṣika system. This virtue will not only yield the fruits of works, such as kāma and artha (which the Vaiśeṣika sage will know to appreciate at a distance) but it will also yield the highest good: mokṣa.

c. Sāṅkhya

The term “Sāṅkhya” means ‘enumeration’ and it suggests a methodology of philosophical analysis. On many accounts, Sāṅkhya is the oldest of the systematic schools of Indian philosophy. It is attributed to the legendary sage Kapila of antiquity, though we have no extant work left to us by him. His views are recounted in many smṛti texts, such as the Bhāgavata Purāṇa and the Bhagavad Gītā, but the Sāṅkhya system appears to stretch back to the end of the Vedic period itself. Key concepts of the Sāṅkhya system appear in the Upaniṣads (Kaṭha Upaniṣad I.3.10–11), suggesting that it is an indigenous Indian philosophical school that developed congenially in parallel with the Vedic tradition. Its relative antiquity appears to be confirmed by the references to the school in classical Jain writings (for instance, Sūtrakṛtānga I.i.1.13), which are known for their antiquity. Unlike many of the other systematic schools of Hindu philosophy, the Sāṅkhya system does not explicitly attempt to align itself with the authority of the Vedas (cf. Sāṅkhya Kārikā 2).

The oldest systematic writing on Sāṅkhya that we have is Īśvarakṛṣna’s Sāṅkhya Kārikā (4th cent. C.E.). In it we have the classic Sāṅkhya ontology and metaphysic set out, along with its theory of agency.

According to the Sāṅkhya system, the cosmos is the result of the mutual contact of two distinct metaphysical categories: Prakṛti (Nature), and Puruṣa (person). Prakṛti, or Nature, is the material principle of the cosmos and is comprised of three guṇas, or "qualities." These are sattva, rajas, and tamas. Sattva is illuminating, buoyant and a source of pleasure; rajas is actuating, propelling and a source of pain; tamas is still, enveloping and a source of indifference (Sāṅkhya Kārikā 12-13).

Puruṣa, in contrast, has the quality of consciousness. It is the entity that the personal pronoun “I” actually refers to. It is eternally distinct from Nature, but it enters into complex configurations of Nature (biological bodies) in order to experience and to have knowledge. According to the Sāṅkhya tradition, mind, mentality, intellect or Mahat (the Great one) is not a part of the Puruṣa, but the result of the complex organization of matter, or the guṇas. Mentality is the closest thing in Nature to Puruṣa, but it is still a natural entity, rooted in materiality. Puruṣa, in contrast, is a pure witness. It lacks the ability to be an agent. Thus, on the Sāṅkhya account, when it seems as though we as persons are making decisions, we are mistaken: it is actually our natural constitution comprised by the guṇas that make the decision. The Puruṣa does nothing but lend consciousness to the situation (Sāṅkhya Kārikā 12-13, 19, 21).

The contact of Prakṛti and Puruṣa, on the Sāṅkhya account, is not a chance occurrence. Rather, the two principles make contact so that Puruṣa can come to have knowledge of its own nature. A Puruṣa comes to have such knowledge when sattva, the illuminating guṇa, assumes a governing position in a bodily constitution. The moment that this knowledge comes about, a Puruṣa becomes liberated. The Puruṣa is no longer bound by the actions and choices of its body’s constitution. However, liberation consists in the end of karma tying the Puruṣa to Prakṛti: it does not coincide with the complete annihilation of past karma, which would consist in the disentangling of a Puruṣa from Prakṛti. Hence, the Sāṅkhya Kārikā likens the self-realization of the Puruṣa to a potter’s wheel, which continues to spin down, after the potter has ceased putting energy to keep the wheel in motion (Sāṅkhya Kārikā 67).

Students of ancient Western philosophy are apt to note that the Sāṅkhya guṇas, and the dualistic theory of personhood, appear to have echos in Plato (4th cent. B.C.E.). Plato held that the body is the casing of the soul (though Plato, at Phaedo 81 and Phaedrus 250c suggests it is a prison, which the Sāṅkhya system does not), and that the embodied soul is composed of three characteristics: an earthy quality geared toward menial tasks that is appetitive (corresponding to bronze), a high-spirited quality geared towards accomplishment and competition (silver), and a reflective or rational portion that is in a position to put in order the constitution of the soul (gold) (Republic 3.415, 4.435–42). Prima facie, the bronze quality appears to correspond to tamas, silver to rajas, and sattva to gold. Owing to the antiquity of the Sāṅkhya system, it is historically implausible that it was influenced by Platonistic thought. This of course invites the contrary proposal, that Plato was influenced by the Sāṅkhya system. While Indian philosophers had an important impact on the course of ancient Greek philosophy (through Pyrrho of Elis, who traveled to India in the 3rd cent. B.C.E. and was impressed by a type of dialectic nihilism characteristic of some Buddhist philosophies, promoted by gymnosophists—naked wise people—who resemble Jain monks) (see Flintoff), there is no historical evidence to suggest that Sāṅkhya thought made its way to ancient Greece. This suggests that both Plato (4th cent. B.C.E.), and the Sāṅkhya system (dating back to the 6th cent. B.C.E. in the Vedas) articulate an ancient Indo-European philosophical perspective that predates both Plato and the Sāṅkhya system, if the similarities between the two are not purely coincidental.

d. Yoga

The Yoga tradition shares much with the Sāṅkhya darśana. Like the Sāṅkhya philosophy, traces of the Yoga tradition can be found in the Upaniṣads. While the systematic expression of the Yoga philosophy comes to us from Patañjali’s Yoga Sūtra, it comes relatively late in the history of philosophy (at the end of the epic period, roughly 3rd century C.E.), the Yoga philosophy is also expressed in the Bhagavad Gītā. The Yoga philosophy shares with Sāṅkhya its dualistic cosmology. Like Sāṅkhya, the Yoga philosophy does not attempt to explicitly derive its authority from the Vedas. However, Yoga departs from Sāṅkhya on an important metaphysical and moral point—the nature of agency—and from Sāṅkhya in its emphasis on practical means to achieve liberation.

Like the Sāṅkhya tradition, the Yoga darśana holds that the cosmos is the result of the interaction of two categories: Prakṛti (Nature) and Puruṣa (Person). Like the Sāṅkhya tradition, the Yoga tradition is of the opinion that Prakṛti, or Nature, is comprised of three guṇas, or qualities. These are the same three qualities extolled in the Sāṅkhya system—tamas, rajas, and sattva—though the Yoga Sūtra refers to many of these by different terms (cf. Yoga Sūtra II.18). As with the Sāṅkhya system, liberation in the Yoga system is facilitated by the ascendance of sattva in a person’s mind, which permits enlightenment on the nature of the self.

A relatively important point of cosmological difference is that the Yoga system does not consider the Mind or the Intellect (Mahat) to be the greatest creation of Nature. A major difference between the two schools concerns Yoga’s picture of how liberation is achieved. On the Sāṅkhya account, liberation comes about by Nature enlightening the Puruṣa, for Puruṣas are mere spectators (cf. Sāṅkhya Kārikā 62). In the contexts of the Yoga darśana, the Puruṣa is not a mere spectator, but an agent: Puruṣa is regarded as the “lord of the mind” (Yoga Sūtra IV.18): for Yoga it is the effort of the Puruṣa that brings about liberation. The empowered account of Puruṣa in the Yoga system is supplemented by a detail account of the practical means by which Puruṣa can bring about its own liberation.

The Yoga Sūtra tells us that the point of yoga is to still perturbations of the mind—the main obstacle to liberation (Yoga Sūtra I.2). The practice of the Yoga philosophy comes to those with energy (Yoga Sūtra I.21). In order to facilitate the calming of the mind, the Yoga system prescribes several moral and practical means. The core of the practical import of the Yoga philosophy is what it calls the Astāṅga yoga (not to be confused with a tradition of physical yoga also called Astāṅga Yoga, popular in many yoga centers in recent times). The Astāṅga yoga sets out the eight (aṣṭa) limbs (anga) of the practice of yoga (Yoga Sūtra II.29). The eight limbs include:

  • yama – abstention from evil-doing, which specifically consists of abstention from harming others (Ahiṃsā), abstention from telling falsehoods (asatya), abstention from acquisitiveness (asteya), abstention from greed/envy (aparigraha); and sexual restraint (brahmacarya)
  • niyamas – various observances, which include the cultivation of purity (sauca), contentment (santos) and austerities (tapas)
  • āsana – posture
  • prāṇāyāma – control of breath
  • pratyāhāra – withdrawal of the mind from sense objects
  • dhāranā– concentration
  • dhyāna – meditation
  • samādhi – absorption [in the self] (Yoga Sūtra II.29-32)

According to the Yoga Sūtra, the yama rules “are basic rules.... They must be practiced without any reservations as to time, place, purpose, or caste rules” (Yoga Sūtra II.31). The failure to live a morally pure life constitutes a major obstacle to the practice of Yoga (Yoga Sūtra II.34). On the plus side, by living the morally pure life, all of one’s needs and desires are fulfilled:

When [one] becomes steadfast in… abstention from harming others, then all living creatures will cease to feel enmity in [one’s] presence. When [one] becomes steadfast in… abstention from falsehood, [one] gets the power of obtaining for [oneself] and others the fruits of good deeds, without [others] having to perform the deeds themselves. When [one] becomes steadfast in… abstention from theft, all wealth comes.… Moreover, one achieves purification of the heart, cheerfulness of mind, the power of concentration, control of the passions and fitness for vision of the Ātma [self, or Puruṣa]. “(Yoga Sūtra II.35–41)

The steadfast practice of the Astāṅga yoga results in counteracting past karmas. This culminates in a milestone-liberating event: dharmameghasamādhi (or the absorption in the cloud of virtue). In this penultimate state, the aspirant has all their past sins washed away by a cloud of dharma (virtue, or morality). This leads to the ultimate state of liberation for the yogi, kaivalya (Yoga Sūtra IV.33). “Kaivalya” translates as “aloneness.”

Critics of the Yoga system charge that it cannot be accepted on moral grounds for it has as its ultimate goal a state of isolation. On this view, kaivalya is understood literally as a state of social isolation (see Bharadwaja). The defender of the Yoga Sūtra can point out that this reading of "kaivalya" takes the final event of liberation in the Yoga system out of context. The penultimate event that paves way for the state of kaivalya is a wholly moral event (dharmameghasamādhi) and the path that leads to this morally perfecting event is itself an intrinsically moral endeavor (Astāṅga yoga, and particularly the yamas). If the concept of ‘kaivalya’ is to be understood in the context of the Yoga system’s preoccupation with morality, it seems that it must be understood as a function of moral perfection. Given the uncommon journey that the yogi takes, it is also natural to conclude that the state of kaivalya is the state characterized by having no peers, owing to the radical shift in perspective that the yogi attains through yoga. The yogi, at the point of kaivalya, no longer sees things from the perspective of individuals in society, but from the perspective of the Puruṣa. This arguably is the yogi’s loneliness.

e. Pūrvamīmāṃsā

The Pūrvamīmāṃsā school of Hindu philosophy gains its name from the portion of the Vedas that it is primarily concerned with: the earlier (pūrva) inquiry (Mīmāṃsā), or the karma khaṇḍa. In the context of Hinduism, the Pūrvamīmāṃsā school is one of the most orthodox of the Hindu philosophical schools because of its concern to elaborate and defend the contents of the early, ritually oriented part of the Vedas. Like many other schools of Indian philosophy, Pūrvamīmāṃsā takes dharma ("duty" or "ethics") as its primary focus (Mīmāṃsā Sūtra I.i.1). Unlike all other schools of Hindu philosophy, Pūrvamīmāṃsā did not take mokṣa, or liberation, as something to extol or elaborate upon. The very topic of liberation is nowhere discussed in the foundational text of this tradition, and is recognized for the first time by the medieval Pūrvamīmāṃsā author Kumārila (7th cent. C.E.) as a real objective worth pursuing in conjunction with dharma (Kumārila V.xvi.108–110).

The school of philosophy known as Pūrvamīmāṃsā has its roots in the Mīmāṃsā Sūtra, written by Jaimini (1st cent. C.E.). The Mīmāṃsā Sūtra, like the Vaiśeṣika Sūtra, begins with the assertion that its main concern is the elaboration of dharma. The second verse tells us that dharma (or the ethical) is an injunction (codana) that has the distinction (lakṣaṇa) of bringing about welfare (artha) (Mīmāṃsā Sūtra I.i.1-2).

The Pūrvamīmāṃsā system is distinguished from other Hindu philosophical schools—but for the Vedānta systems—in its view that the Vedas are epistemically foundational. Foundationalism is the view that certain knowledge claims are independently valid (which means that no further justificatory reasons are either possible or necessary to justify these claims), and moreover, that these independently valid knowledge claims are able to serve as justifications for beliefs that are based upon them. Such independently valid knowledge claims are thought to be justificatory foundations of a system of beliefs. While all Hindu philosophical schools recognize the validity of the Vedas, only the Pūrvamīmāṃsā and Vedānta systems explicitly regard the Vedas as foundational, and being in no need of further justification: “… instruction [in the Vedas] is the means of knowing it (dharma)—infallible regarding all that is imperceptible; it is a valid means of knowledge, as it is independent…” (Mīmāṃsā Sūtra I.i.5). The justificatory capacity of the Vedas serves to ground the smṛti literature, for it is the sacred tradition based on the Vedas (Mīmāṃsā Sūtra I.iii.2). If a smṛti text conflicts with the Vedas, the Vedas are to be preferred. When there is no conflict, we are entitled to presume that the Vedas stand as support for the smṛti text (Mīmāṃsā Sūtra I.iii.3).

Pūrvamīmāṃsā perhaps more than any other school of Indian philosophy made a sizable contribution to Indian debates on the philosophy of language. Some of Pūrvamīmāṃsā’s distinctive linguistic theses impact on theological matters. One distinctive thesis of the Pūrvamīmāṃsā tradition is that the relationship between a word and its referent is "inborn" and not mediated by authorial intention (Mīmāṃsā Sūtra I.i.5). The second view is that words, or verbal units (śabda), are eternal existents. This view contrasts sharply with the view taken by the Nyāya philosophers, that words have a temporary existence, and are brought in and out of existence by utterance (Nyāya Sūtra II.ii.13, cf. Mīmāṃsā Sūtra I.i.6-11). The commentator Śabara (5th cent. C.E.) explains the Pūrvamīmāṃsā view thus:

…the word is manifested (not produced) by human effort; that is to say, if, before being pronounced, the word was not manifest, it becomes manifested by the effort (or pronouncing). Thus it is found that the fact of words being “seen after effort” is equally compatible with both views.… The Word must be eternal;—why?—because its utterance is for the purpose of another…. If the word ceased to exist as soon as uttered then no one could speak of any thing to others…. Whenever the word “go” (cow) is uttered, there is a notion of all cows simultaneously. From this it follows that the word denotes the Class. And it is not possible to create the relation of the Word to a Class; because in creating the relation, the creator would have to lay down the relation by pointing to the Class; and without actually using the word “go” (which he could not use before he has laid down its relation to its denotation) in what manner could he point to the distinct class denoted by the word “go”…. (Śabara Bhāṣya on Mīmāṃsā Sūtra I.i.12-19, pp. 33–38)

Hence, the only solution to the problem of how words have their meaning, on the Pūrvamīmāṃsā account, is that they have them eternally. If they do not have their meaning eternally and independent of subjective associations between referents and words, communication would be impossible. These strikingly Platonistic positions on the nature of meaning allows the Pūrvamīmāṃsā tradition to argue that the Vedas are an eternally existing, unauthored corpus, and that it’s validity is beyond reproach: “... if the Veda be eternal its denotation cannot but be eternal; and if it be non-eternal (caused), then it can have no validity...” (Kumārila XXVII–XXXII, cf. V.xi.1).

Views in the history of Hindu philosophy that contrast with the Pūrvamīmāṃsā view, on the question of the source and nature of the Vedas, is the view implicit in the Nyāya Sūtra, and stated more clearly by the later syncretic Vaiśeṣika (and Nyāya) author Śaṅkara-Misra (Vaiśeṣika Sūtra Bhāṣya, p.7): the Vedas is the testimony of a particular person (namely God). This is a view that also appears to be echoed in the theistic schools of Vedānta, such as Viśiṣṭādvaita, where God is alluded to as the author of the Vedas (cf. Rāmānuja’s Bhagavad Gītā Bhāṣya 18:58).

f. Vedānta

Like the Pūrvamīmāṃsā tradition, the Vedānta school is concerned with explicating the contents of a particular portion of the Vedas. While the Pūrvamīmāṃsā concerns itself with the former portion of the Vedas, the Vedānta school concerns the end (anta) of the Vedas. Whereas the principal concern of the earlier portion of the Vedas is action and dharma, the principal concern of the latter portion of the Vedas is knowledge and mokṣa.

Philosophies that count technically as expressions of the Vedānta philosophy find their classical expression in a commentary on a synopsis of the Upaniṣads. The synopsis of the contents of the Upaniṣads is called the Vedānta Sūtras, or the Brahma Sūtras, and its author is Bādarāyana (1st cent. C.E.). The latter portion of the Vedas is a vast corpus that does not elaborate a single doctrine in the manner of a monograph. Rather, it is a collection of speculative texts of the Vedas with overlapping themes and images. A common thread that runs through most of the Upaniṣads is a concern to elaborate the nature of the Ultimate, or Brahman, Ātma or the Self (often equated in these texts with Brahman) and what in the subsequent tradition is known as the jīva, or the individual psychological unity. The Upaniṣads are relatively clear that Brahman stands to creation as its source and support, but its unsystematic nature leaves much to be specified in the way of doctrine. While Bādarāyana’s Brahma Sūtra is the systematization of the teachings of the Upaniṣads, many of the verses of the Brahma Sūtra are obscure and unintelligible without a commentary.

Owing to the cryptic nature of the Brahma Sūtra itself, many commentarial subtraditions have evolved in Vedānta. As a result, it is possible to misleadingly use the term “Vedānta” as though it stood for one comprehensive doctrine. Rather, the term “Vedānta” is best understood as a term embracing within it divergent philosophical views that have a common textual connection: their classical expression as a commentary on Bādarāyana’s text.

There are three famous commentaries (Bhāṣyas) on the Brahma Sūtra that shine in the history of Hindu philosophy. These are the 8th century C.E. commentary of Śaṅkara (Advaita) the 12th century C.E. commentary of Rāmānuja (Viśiṣṭādvaita) and the 13th century C.E. commentary by Madhva (Dvaita). These three are not the only commentaries. There appears to have been no less than twenty-one commentators on the Brahma Sūtra prior to Madhva (Sharma, vol.1 p.15), and Madhva is by no means the last commentator on the Brahma Sūtra either. Important names in the history of Indian theology are amongst the latter day commentators: Nimbārka (13th cent. C.E.), Śrkaṇṭha(15th cent. C.E.), Vallabha (16th cent. C.E.), and Baladeva (18th cent. C.E.). However, the majority of the commentaries prior to Śaṅkara have been lost to history. The philosophical positions expressed in the various commentaries fall into four major camps of Vedānta: Bhedābheda, Advaita, Viśiṣṭādvaita and Dvaita. They principally differ on the metaphysics of individual selves and Brahman, though there are also some striking ethical differences between these schools as well.

i. Bhedābheda

According to the Bhedābheda view, Brahman converts itself into the created, but yet maintains a distinct identity. Thus, the school holds that Brahman is both different (bheda) and not different (abheda) from creation and the individual jīva.

The philosophical persuasion that has produced the most commentaries on the Brahma Sūtra is the Bhedābheda philosophy. Textual evidence suggests that all of the commentaries authored prior to Śaṅkara’s famous Advaita commentary on the Brahma Sūtra subscribed to a form of Bhedābheda, which one historian calls “Pantheistic Realism” (Sharma, pp. 15-7). And on natural readings, it appears that most of the remaining commentators (but for the three famous commentators) also promulgate an interpretation of the Brahma Sūtra that falls within the Bhedābheda camp.

ii. Commonalities of the Three Famous Commentaries

While the three major commentators on the Brahma Sūtra’s differ on important metaphysical questions like the nature and relationship of Brahman to creation and jīvas, or the important moral questions on the priority of Vedic morality, there are some common views that they all share.

All of the three major schools of Vedānta hold that the Vedas are the ultimate source of knowledge of Brahman, and that the Vedas have an independent validity, not reducible or contingent upon the validity of any other means of knowledge (Śaṅkara’s, Rāmānuja’s and Madhva’s Brahma Sūtra Bhāṣyas, I.i.1-3). This interpretation of the Brahma Sūtra pits the Vedānta tradition against the Nyāya optimism about natural theology. For the major schools of Vedānta, natural reason cannot, on its own, arrive at knowledge of the existence of God (Brahman). (For a detailed criticism of the Nyāya natural theology, see Rāmānuja’s Brahma Sūtra Bhāṣya pp. 162-74.)

Rāmānuja and Śaṅkara both regard the individual jīva as being uncreated, and having no beginning (Śaṅkara’s Brahma Sūtra Bhāṣya II.iii.16; Rāmānuja’s Brahma Sūtra Bhāṣya II.iii.18). Madhva concurs that individual souls are eternal, but yet insists that it is correct to regard Brahman as the source of individual souls (Madhva’s Brahma Sūtra Bhāṣya II.iii.19).

The three major commentators on the Brahma Sūtra see eye to eye on the nature of the individual as agent. According to Śaṅkara, Rāmānuja and Madhva, the individual, or jīva, is an agent, with desires and goals. However, in and of itself, it has no power to make its will manifest. Brahman, on all three accounts, steps in and grants the fruits of the desires of an individual. Thus while on this account individuals are agents, they are really also quite impotent. (Śaṅkara’s and Rāmānuja’s Brahma Sūtra Bhāṣyas I.iii.41; Madhva’s Brahma Sūtra Bhāṣya II.iii.42). All three authors are sensitive to the fact that Brahman’s help in bringing about the fruits of desires of individuals implicates Brahman in the evils of the world, and hence opens up the problem of evil. The theodicy of all three relies upon the doctrine of the eternality of the individual jīva. Since there is always some prior choice and action on the part of the individual according to which Brahman has to dispense consequences, at no point can Brahman be accused of partiality, cruelty, or making persons choose the things that they do (Śaṅkara’s and Rāmānuja’s Brahma Sūtra Bhāṣyas II.i.34; Madhva Bhāṣya II.i.35, iii.42).

Finally, Rāmānuja and Śaṅkara both appear to take a position on the propriety of animal sacrifices as prescribed in the Vedas that is reminiscent of the Pūrvamīmāṃsā deferral to the Vedas on all matters of morality. According to both Śaṅkara and Rāmānuja, animal sacrifices cannot be regarded as evils for they are enjoined in the Vedas, and the Vedas is the ultimate authority on such matters (Śaṅkara’s and Rāmānuja’s Brahma Sūtra Bhāṣya III.i.25). Madhva in contrast is reputed to have been a staunch opponent of animal sacrifices, who held that such rituals are a result of a corruption of the Vedic tradition. He interprets the Brahma Sūtra in such a way that the question of animal sacrifices does not arise.

iii. Advaita

Combining the negative particle “a” with the term “dvaita” creates the term “advaita”. The term “dvaita” is often translated as “dualism” as the term “advaita” is often translated as “non-dualism.” In the case of Dvaita Vedānta, this convention of translation is misleading, for Dvaita Vedānta does not, like the Sāṅkhya system, propound a metaphysical dualism. Indeed, Dvaita Vedānta holds an explicitly pluralistic metaphysics. Rather, “dvaita” in the context of Vedānta nomenclature is an ordinal, meaning “secondness.” Dvaita Vedānta, thus, holds that there is such a thing as secondness—something extra, that comes after the first: Brahman. Advaita Vedānta, in contrast, holds that Brahman is one without a second. “Advaita” can thus be translated as “monism,” “non-duality” or most perspicuously as “non-secondness” (Hacker p.131n21).

The principal author in the Advaita tradition is Śaṅkara. In addition to writing several philosophical works, Śaṅkara the commentator on the Brahma Sūtra, set up four monasteries in the four corners of India. Successive heads of the monasteries, according to tradition, take Śaṅkara’s name. This has contributed to great confusion about the views that Śaṅkara, the commentator on the Brahma Sūtras held, for many of his successors also authored philosophical works with the same name. On the basis of comparing writing style, vocabulary, and the colophons of the various works attributed to “Śaṅkara,” the German philologist and scholar of Indian philosophy, Paul Hacker, has concluded that only a portion of the works attributed to Śaṅkara are by the author of the commentary on the Brahma Sūtras (Hacker pp. 41-56). These genuine works include commentaries on the Upaniṣads, and a commentary on the Bhagavad Gītā. The following explication will be restricted to such works.

It is commonly held that Śaṅkara argued that the common sense, empirical world as we know it is an illusion, or māyā. The term “māyā” does not figure prominently in the genuine writings of Śaṅkara. However, it is an accurate assessment that Śaṅkara holds that the majority of our beliefs about the reality of a plurality of objects and persons are ultimately false.

Śaṅkara’s philosophy and criticism of common sense rests on an argument unique to him in the history of Indian philosophy—an argument that Śaṅkara sets at the outset of his commentary on the Brahma Sūtra. From this argument from superimposition, the ordinary human psyche (which self identifies with a body, a unique personal history, and distinguishes itself from a plurality of other persons and objects) comes about by an erroneous superimposition of the characteristics of subjectivity (consciousness, or the sense of being a witness), with the category of objects (which includes the characteristics of having a body, existing at a certain time and place and being numerically distinct from other objects). According to Śaṅkara, these categories are opposed to each other as night and day. And hence, the conflation of the two categories is fallacious. However, it is also a creative mistake. As a result of this superimposition, the jīva (individual person) is constructed complete with psychological integrity, and a natural relationship with a body (Śaṅkara Brahma Sūtra Bhāṣya, Preamble to I.i.1). All of this is brought about by beginningless nescience (avidyā)—a creative factor at play in the creation of the cosmos.

In reality, all there really is on Śaṅkara’s account is Brahman: objects of its awareness, such as the entire universe, exist within the realm of its consciousness. The liberation of the individual jīva occurs when it undoes the error of superimposition, and no longer identifies itself with a body, or a particular person with a natural history, but with Brahman.

It is worth stressing that Śaṅkara’s view is not a form of subjective idealism, or solipsism in any ordinary sense. For those sympathetic to Śaṅkara’s account, superimposition is an objective occurrence that happens most anywhere there is an ordinary organism with a living body. However, Śaṅkara’s system is properly characterized as a form of Absolute Idealism, for on its account only the undifferentiated Absolute is ultimately real, while affairs of the world are its thoughts.

Śaṅkara’s Advaita tradition is known for giving a nuanced, and two-part account of the ‘self’ and ‘Brahman.’ On Śaṅkara’s account, there is a lower and higher self. The lower self is the jīva, while the higher self (the real referent of the personal pronoun “I,” used by anyone) is the one real Self: Ātma, which on Śaṅkara’ s account is Brahman. Likewise, on Śaṅkara’s account, there is a lower and a higher Brahman (Śaṅkara Brahma Sūtra Bhāṣya IV.3.16. pp. 403-4). The lower Brahman is the personal God that pious devotees pray to and meditate on, while the Higher Brahman is devoid of most all such qualities, is impersonal, and is characterized as being essentially bliss (ānanda) (Śaṅkara Brahma Sūtra Bhāṣya III.3.14) truth (satyam) knowledge (jñānam) and infinite (anantam) (cf. Śaṅkara, Taittitrīya Upaniṣad Bhāṣya II.i.1.). The lower Brahman, or the personal God that people pray to, can be afforded the title of “Brahman” owing to its proximity to the Highest Brahman: in the world of plurality, it is the closest thing to the Ultimate (Śaṅkara Brahma Sūtra Bhāṣya IV.3.9). However, it too, like the concept of the individual person, is a result of the error of superimposing the qualities of objectivity and subjectivity on each other (Śaṅkara, Brahma Sūtra Bhāṣya IV.3.10). In the Advaita tradition, the lower Brahman is known as the saguṇa Brahman (or Brahman with qualities) while the highest Brahman is known as the nirguṇa Brahman (or Brahman without qualities) (Śaṅkara Brahma Sūtra Bhāṣya III.2.21).

Śaṅkara takes a skeptical attitude towards the importance of dharma, or morality. On Śaṅkara’s account, so long as one exists as a construction of necessience, operating under the erroneous assumption that one is a distinct object from Brahman and other objects, then one ought to follow the Vedas and its injunctions regarding dharma for it will help form tendencies to look within (Śaṅkara, Bhagavad Gītā Bhāṣya on 18:66). However, for the serious aspirant, Śaṅkara regards dharma as an impediment to liberation—it too must be abandoned, lest an individual reinforce their self-identification with a body in contradistinction to other bodies and persons (Śaṅkara, Bhagavad Gītā Bhāṣya on 4:21). Those sympathetic to Śaṅkara’s philosophy often regard Śaṅkara’s skepticism about dharma as a liberal and progressive aspect to his philosophy, for it devalues the importance of Vedic dharma, which contains within it caste morality. Critics of Śaṅkara are likely to regard Śaṅkara’s skepticism about the importance of dharma as troubling, not because it implies that we should forsake Vedic dharma, but because it suggests that we ought to give up moral concerns, altogether, for the sake of spiritual pursuits (lest we fall back into the fallacy of superimposition).

iv. Viśistādvaita

The term “Viśiṣṭādvaita” is often translated as "Qualified Non-Dualism." An alternative, and more informative, translation is “Non-duality of the qualified whole,” or perhaps ‘Non-duality with qualifications.” The principal exponent of this school of Vedānta is Rāmānuja, who attempted to eschew the illusionist implications of Advaita Vedānta, and the perceived logical problems of the Bhedābheda view while attempting to reconcile the portions of the Upaniṣads that affirmed a substantial monism and those that affirmed substantial pluralism. Rāmānuja’s solution to his problematic is to argue for a theistic and organismic conception of Brahman.

The theism of Rāmānuja’s Viśiṣṭādvaita shows up in his insistence that Brahman is a specific deity (Viṣṇu, also known as “Nārāyana”) who is an abode of an infinite number of auspicious qualities. The organismic aspect of Rāmānuja’s model consists in his view that all things that we normally consider as distinct from Brahman (such as individual persons or jīvas, mundane objects, and other unexalted qualities) constitute the Body of Brahman, while the Ātman spoken of in the Upaniṣads is the non-body, or mental component of Brahman. The result is a metaphysic that regards Brahman as the only substance, but yet affirms the existence of a plurality of abstract and concrete objects as the qualities of Brahman’s Body and Soul (Vedārthasaṅgraha §2).

Rāmānuja holds that in the absence of stains of passed karma the jīva (individual person) resembles Brahman in being of the nature of consciousness and knowledge (Rāmānuja, Brahma Sūtra Bhāṣya, I.i.1. “Great Siddhānta” pp. 99-102). Past actions cloud our true nature and force us to act out their consequences. On Rāmānuja’s account, the prime way of extricating ourselves from the beginningless effects of karma involves bhakti, or devotion to God. But bhakti on its own is not sufficient, or at least, bhakti if it is to bring about liberation must either be combined with the karma yoga mentioned in the Bhagavad Gītā, or it must turn into bhakti yoga. For attending to one’s dharma (duty) is the chief means by which one can propitiate God, on Rāmānuja’s account (Rāmānuja, Gītā Bhāṣya, XVIII.47 p.583). Moreover, in attending to one’s dharma in the deontological spirit characteristic of karma yoga and consonant with bhakti yoga one prevents the development of new karmic dispositions, and can allow the past stores of karma to be naturally extinguished. This will have the effect of unclouding the individual jīva’s omniscience, and bringing the jīva closer to a vision of God, which alone is an unending source of joy (Vedārthasaṅgraha §241). Unlike Śaṅkara, Rāmānuja insists that dharma is never to be abandoned (Rāmānuja, Bhagavad Gītā Bhāṣya XVIII.66, p.599).

v. Dvaita

Madhva is one of the principal theistic exponents of Vedānta. On his account, Brahman is a personal God, and specifically He is the Hindu deity Viṣṇu.

According to Madhva, reality is characterized by a five fold difference: (i) jīvas (individual persons) are different from God; (ii) jīvas are also different from each other; (iii) inanimate objects are different from God; (iv) inanimate objects are different from other inanimate objects; (v) inanimate objects are different from jīvas (Mahābhāratatātparnirnayaḥ, I. 70-71). The number of types of entities on Madhva’s account appears thus to be three: God, jīvas, and inanimate objects. However, the actual number of objects on Madhva’s account appears to be very high. This substantial pluralism sets Madhva apart from the other principle exponents of Vedānta.

A distinctive doctrine of Madhva’s Vedānta is his view that jīvas fall into a hierarchy, with the most exalted jīvas occupying a place below Viṣṇu (such as Viṣṇu’s companions in his eternal abode) to the lowest jīvas, who occupy dark hell regions. Moreover, on Madhva’s account, the ranking of jīvas is eternal, and hence those who occupy the lowest hells are eternally damned. Amongst the middle level jīvas, the Gods and the most virtuous of humans are eligible for liberation. The average amongst the middle rung jīvas transmigrate forever, while the lowest amongst the middle level jīvas find themselves in the upper hells (Mahābhāratatātparnirnayaḥ I.85-88).

Madhva holds that liberation comes to those who appreciate the five fold differences and the hierarchy of the jīvas (Mahābhāratatātparnirnayaḥ, 81-2). However, ultimately, whether one is liberated or not is completely at the discretion of Brahman, and Brahman is pleased by nothing more than bhakti, or devotion (Mahābhāratatātparnirnayaḥ I.117).

g. Classical Hindu Philosophy in the Context of Indian Philosophy

Hindu philosophy did not develop in a vacuum. Rather, it is an inextricable part of the history of Indian philosophy. Hence, other Indian philosophical movements did not only influence Hindu philosophy, but it also arguably had an influence on their development as well.

The most salient manner in which Hindu philosophy was influenced by other Indian philosophical developments is in the realm of ethics. In its infancy, Hindu philosophy as set out in the action portion of the Vedas was wedded to the practice of animal sacrifices (see Aitareya Brāhmana, book II.1-2). Buddhism and Jainism were both critical of the practice. Buddhism as a philosophy devoted to the alleviation of suffering is disposed to see animal sacrifices as involving unnecessary suffering. Jainism, in contrast, had made Ahiṃsā, or non-harmfulness, its chief moral virtue. Jainism might very well have been the first religio-philosophical movement in India staunchly wedded to vegetarianism. And while vegetarianism was alien to early Hindu practice, it has become an integral part of Hindu orthodoxy in many parts of India. Now, for many Hindus, the very idea of eating meat is the very archetype of immoral and irreligious behavior. This attitude can be found amongst the most orthodox followers of both Śaṅkara and Rāmānuja, who, as noted, defended the propriety of animal sacrifices. The shift in the general attitude of many Hindus arguably goes to the credit of Jainism, a once prevalent religion in India, which has been a source of tireless criticism of violence.

A case might also be made for the influence of Jainism on the Yoga darśana. Specifically, the yama rules found in the Yoga darśana, which include Ahiṃsā, are identical to the five Great vows of Jainism (Ācāraṅga Sūtra II.15.i.1–v.1). While it is possible that these precepts have a third common source, or that they are indigenous to the Yoga tradition, it is also highly probable that they were incorporated, early on, into the Yoga tradition by way of influence of Jain thought. The Yoga tradition also shows the mark of being influenced by Mahāyāna Buddhism in its account of “dharmameghasamādhi”—a term that shows up in many latter day Buddhist texts (see Klostermaier).

In the realm of metaphysics, a controversial argument can be made that Hindu philosophy, as found in the Upaniṣads, has exercised a profound effect on the development of latter day Indian Buddhist thought. Increasingly, in the context of latter Indian Buddhism, there is a movement away from a seeming agnosticism to an affirmation of the Ultimate in terms of a master concept, which designates both the grounding and the source of all. For Buddhist Idealism (Yogācāra, or Vijñānavāda) the master concept is that of Consciousness-Only, and in the context of Mādhyamika Buddhism of Nāgārjuna (2nd cent. C.E.) the master concept is that of Emptiness, or Śūnyatā. Such a move towards a master concept resembles the Upaniṣad’s employment of the concept "Brahman" and is arguably an adaptation of some elements of the metaphysical picture of the Upaniṣads into Buddhist philosophy.

Similarly, a case might also be made that the notion of “Two-Truths” (the doctrine that there is a distinction to be drawn between conventional truth that operates in ordinary, domestic discourse that recognizes diversity, and Truth from the perspective of the Ultimate which rejects diversity) operative in latter Buddhist thought is also a doctrine that can be found in the Upaniṣads (cf. Muṇdaka Upaniṣad, I.i. 5-6). While this doctrine gets its clearest explication in the context of latter day Buddhist thought in India, it seems that it has its precursor in Vedic speculation.

4. Stage Three: Neo-Hinduism

The term “Neo-Hinduism” refers to a conception of the Hindu religion formed by recent authors who were learned in traditional Indian philosophy, and English. Famous Neo-Hindus include Swami Vivekānanda (1863-1902) the famous disciple of the traditional Hindu saint Rāma-Kṛṣṇa, and India’s first president, Sarvepalli Radhakrishnan (1888-1975) a professional philosopher who held academic posts at various universities in India and Oxford, in the UK.

A famous formulation of the doctrine of Neo-Hinduism is the simile that likens religions to rivers, and the oceans to God: as all rivers lead to the ocean so do all religions lead to God. Similarly, Swami Nirvenananda in his book Hinduism at a Glance writes:

All true religions of the world lead us alike to the same goal, namely, to perfection if, of course, they are followed faithfully. Each of them is a correct path to Divinity. The Hindus have been taught to regard religion in this light. (Nivernananda, p.20.)

Frequently, Neo-Hindu authors identify Hinduism with Vedānta in their elaboration of Neo-Hindu doctrine, and in this formulation we find another tenet of Neo-Hinduism: Hinduism is not simply another religion, but a meta-religion, or the philosophy of religion. Hence, we find Vivekānanda writes:

Ours is the universal religion. It is inclusive enough, it is broad enough to include all the ideals. All the ideals of religion that already exist in the world can be immediately included, and we can patiently wait for all the ideals that are to come in the future to be taken in the same fashion, embraced in the infinite arms of the religion of Vedānta. (Vivekānanda, vol. III p.251-2.)

Similarly, Radhakrishnan holds “[t]he Vedānta is not a religion, but religion itself in its most universal and deepest significance” (Radhakrishnan, 35).

The view identified as Neo-Hinduism here might be understood as a form of Universalism or liberal theology that attempts to ground religion itself in Hindu philosophy. Neo-Hinduism must be distinguished from another theological view that has a long history in India, which we might call Inclusivist Theology. According to Inclusivist Theology, there are elements in any number of religious practices that are consonant with the one true religion, and if a practitioner of a contrary religion holds fast to those elements in their religion that are correct, they will eventually attain the Ultimate. Often, this view finds expression in the widespread Hindu view that all the various deities are really lower manifestations of one true deity (for example, a Vaiṣṇava who held an Inclusivist theology might interpret all deities, in so far as they are consonant with the qualities attributed to Viṣṇu, to be lower manifestations of Viṣṇu, and thus good first steps to conceptualizing the Ultimate). Neo-Hinduism, in contrast, makes no distinction between deities, religions, or elements within religions, for all religions operate at the level of the practical, while the Ultimate, ex hypothesi, is transcendent. There is no religion, or no portion of any religion, which is incorrect, on this view, for all are equally human efforts to strive for the Divine. Neo-Hindus do not typically regard themselves as forming a new philosophy or religion, though the doctrine expressed by Neo-Hinduism is characterized by theses and concerns not clearly expressed in classical Hindu philosophy. As a rule, Neo-Hinduism is a reformulation of Advaita Vedānta, which emphasizes the implicit liberal theological tendencies that follow from the two-fold account of Brahman.

Recall that on Śaṅkara’s account a distinction is to be drawn between a lower and higher Brahman. Higher Brahman (nirguṇa Brahman) is impersonal and lacks much of what is normally attributed to God. In contrast, lower Brahman (saguṇa Brahman) has personal characteristics attributed to deities. While the higher Brahman is the eternally existing reality, lower Brahman is a result of the same creative error that results in the construction of normal integrated egos in bodies: superimposition. Neo-Hinduism takes note of the fact that this account of lower Brahman’s nature implies that the deities normally worshiped in a religious context are really natural artefacts, or projections of aesthetic concerns on the Ultimate: they are images of the Ultimate formulated for the sake of religious progress. Neo-Hinduism thus reasons that no one’s personal God is any more the real God than another religion’s personal God: rather, all are equally approximations of the one real, impersonal Brahman that transcends the domestic qualities attributed to it. While personal deities are considerably devalued on this account, the result is a liberal theology that is closed to no religious tradition, in principle, for any religion that personalizes God will be approaching the highest Brahman through the lens of superimposed characteristics of object-qualities on Brahman.

Critics of Neo-Hinduism have noted that while Neo-Hinduism aspires to shun the sectarianism that characterises the history of religion in the West through a spirit of Universalism, Neo-Hinduism itself engages in a sectarianism, in so far as it identifies Hinduism with the true perspective that understands the quality-less nature of the Ultimate (cf. Halbfass, Tradition and Reflection pp. 51-86). In defense of Neo-Hinduism, it could be argued that it is a genuine, modern attempt to re-understand the philosophical implications of earlier Hindu thought, and not an attempt to reconcile the various religions of the world.

Critics might also argue that Neo-Hinduism is bad history: many philosophers that we today regard as Hindu (such as Rāmānuja or Madhva) would not accept the idea that all deities are equal, and that God is ultimately an impersonal entity. Moreover, Śaṅkara, the commentator on the Brahma Sūtras did not argue for the type of Universalism characteristic of Neo-Hinduism, which regards all religious observance as equally valid (though this arguably is an implication of his philosophy). Neo-Hinduism, the critic might argue, is historical revisionism. In response, Neo-Hinduism might defend itself by insisting that it is not in the business of providing an account of the history of all of Hindu philosophy, but only a certain strand that it regards as the most important.

5. Conclusion: the Status of Hindu Philosophy

Hindu philosophers have taken varied views on many important issues in philosophy. Hindu philosophers, for instance, are not in agreement as to whether God is a person. They have not all agreed upon the nature and scope of the epistemic validity of the Vedas, nor have they all agreed on basic questions of axiology, such as the content of morality. Some affirm the importance of Vedicly prescribed acts, such as animal sacrifices, while others, such as the Yoga philosopher Patañjali, appear to suggest that violence is always to be avoided. Likewise, some Hindu philosophers hold that the content of the Vedas as always binding, such as Rāmānuja. Others, such as Śaṅkara, regard it as constituting provisional obligations, subject to a person not being serious about liberation. All Hindu philosophers are not in agreement on whether there is anything like liberation. Most recognize the existence of liberation, while the early Pūrvamīmāṃsā does not. While all Hindu philosophers hold that there is something like an individual self, they differ radically in their account of the reality and nature of this individual. This difference in ontology reflects the rich metaphysical diversity amongst Hindu philosophers: some affirm the existence of a plurality of objects; qualities and relations (such as the Vaiśeṣika, Dvaita Vedānta) while others do not (Advaita Vedānta). Such differences have made Hindu philosophy into a sub-tradition of philosophy within Indian philosophy, and not simply one comprehensive philosophical view amongst many. Hindu philosophy is not a static doctrine, but a growing tradition rich in diverse philosophical perspectives. Contrary to some popular accounts, what is presented as Hindu philosophy in recent times is not simply an elaboration of ancient tradition, but a re-evaluation and dialectical evolution of Hindu philosophical thought. Far from detracting from the authority or authenticity of recent Hindu speculation, what this shows is that Hindu philosophy is a living and vibrant tradition that shows no sign of being fossilized into a curiosity from the past, any time soon.

6. References and Further Readings

a. Primary Sources

  • Ācāraṅga Sūtra. Trans. Harmann Georg Jacobi. Jaina Sūtras. Ed. Harmann Georg Jacobi. Vol. 1. 2 vols. Delhi: AVF Books, 1987.
  • Aiterya Brāhmana. Aiterya Brāhmana of the Ṛg Veda. Trans. Martin Haug. Sacred Books of the Hindus. Ed. B.D. Basu. Allahabad: Sudhindra Nath Vasu, 1922.
  • Bhāgavata Purāṇa. Śrīmad Bhāgavatam. Trans. Tapasyānanda. Madras: Sri Ramakrishna Math, 1981.
  • Chandrakānta. Vaiśeṣika Sūtra (Gloss). Trans. Nandal Sinha. Allahabad: Sudhindra Nath Basu, 1923.
  • Dhammapada. A Source Book in Indian Philosophy. Eds. S. Radhakrishnan and Charles Alexander Moore. Princeton, N.J.: Princeton University Press, 1967. 292-325.
  • Gautama. Nyāya Sūtra. Trans. Satisa Chandra Viyabhusana. Sacred Books of the Hindus. Ed. Nandalal Sinha. 2nd rev. and enl. ed. Vol. 8. Allahabad: Panini Office, 1930.
  • Gautama, Vātsyāyana, and Uddyotakara. The Nyāya-Sūtras of Gautama: with the Bhāṣya of Vātsyāyana and the Vārtika of Uddyotakara. Trans. Ganganatha Jha. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass, 1984.
  • Gītā. Śrīmad Bhagavad Gītā; the Scripture of Mankind. Trans. and Ed. Swāmi Tapasyānanda. Madras: Śrī Ramakrishna Math, 1986.
  • Guṇaratna. Tarkarahasyadīpika. Cārvāka/Lokāyata: an Anthology of Source Materials and Some Recent Studies. Ed. Debiprasad Chattopadhyaya. New Delhi: Indian Council of Philosophical Research in association with Rddhi-India Calcutta, 1990.
  • Īśvarakrsna. Sāṅkhya Kārikā. Trans. S.S. Suryanārāyana-Sastri. Madras University Philosophical Series. no. 3. Ed. S.S. Suryanārāyana-Sastri. 2nd rev. ed. Madras: University of Madras, 1948.
  • Jaimini. Mīmāṃsā Sūtra. Trans. and Ed. Mohan Lal Sandal. Sacred Books of the Hindus. Vol. 27. Allahabad: Sudhindre Nath Basu, 1923.
  • Khaṇḍa. Vaiśeṣika Sūtra. Trans. and Ed. Nandalal Sinha. Sacred Books of the Hindus. Ed. Nandal Sinha. 2nd rev. and enl. ed. Vol. 6. Allahabad: Sudhindra Nath Basu, Panini Office, 1923.
  • Kaṭha Upaniṣad. Trans. and Ed. Swami Gambirananda. Eight Upaniṣads, With the Commentary of Śankarācārya. Ed. Swami Gambirananda. Vol. 2: Advaita Ashrama, 1977. 91-220.
  • Kumārila. Ślokavārtika. 1909 Bibliotheca Indica. Calcutta: Asiatic Society. Trans. Ganganatha Jha. Śrī Garib Das Oriental Series. Vol. 8. Delhi: Śrī Satguru, 1983.
  • Madhva. Mahābhāratātparyanirnayah. Trans. and Ed. K.T. Pandurang. Vol. 1. Chirtanur: Sriman Madhva Siddhantonnanhini Sabha, 1993. Madhva. Vedānta Sūtras with the commentary of Śrī Madhwacharya (Madva Brahma Sūtra Bhāṣya). Trans. S. Subba Rau. Madras: Thompson and Co., 1904.
  • Majjhima Nikāya. The Collection of the Middle Length Sayings. Trans. I. B. Horner. Pali Text Society Translation Series. Vol. 29–31. 3 vols. London: Published for the Pali Text Society by Luzac, 1957.
  • Manu. The Laws of Manu (Manavadharmaśāstra). Trans. G.Buhler. Sacred Books of the East. Ed. Max Müller. Vol. xxv. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1886.
  • Muṇdaka Upaniṣad. Trans. and Ed. Swami Gambirananda. Eight Upaniṣads, With the Commentary of Śankarācārya. Vol. 2: Advaita Ashrama, 1977. 77-172.
  • Patañjali. Yoga Sūtra. Trans. and Ed. Swāmi Prabhavananda. Madras: Ramakrishna Math., 1953.
  • Plato. Phaedo. Trans. Hugh Tredennick. The Collected Dialogues of Plato, Including the Letters. Bollingen Series 71. Eds. Edith Hamilton and Huntington Cairns. New York: Pantheon Books, 1966. 40-99.
  • Plato. Phaedrus. Trans. R. Hackforth. The Collected Dialogues of Plato, Including the Letters. Bollingen Series 71. Eds. Edith Hamilton and Huntington Cairns. New York: Pantheon Books, 1966. 475-525.
  • Plato. Republic. Trans. Paul Shorey. The Collected Dialogues of Plato, Including the Letters. Bollingen Series 71. Eds. Edith Hamilton and Huntington Cairns. New York: Pantheon Books, 1966. 575-844.
  • Puruṣa Sūkta. Śrī Rudram and Puruṣasūktam. Trans. and Ed. Swami Amritananda. Ed. Swami Amritananda. Chennai: Sri Ramakrishna Math, 1997.
  • Radhakrishnan, S. The Hindu View of Life. Books that matter. London: G. Allen & Unwin, 1961.
  • Radhakrishnan, S., and Charles Alexander Moore, eds. A Source Book in Indian Philosophy. Princeton, N.J.: Princeton University Press, 1967.
  • Rāmānuja. Śrī Rāmānuja Gītā Bhāṣya. Trans. and Ed. Swāmi Ādidevānada. Madras: Sri Ramakrishna Math, 1991.
  • Rāmānuja. Vedānta Sūtras with the commentary of Rāmānuja (Rāmānuja Brahma Sūtra Bhāṣya; Śrī Bhāṣya). Trans. George Thibaut. Sacred Books of the East. Vol. 48. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass, 1996.
  • Rāmānuja. Vedārthasaṅgraha. Trans. and Ed. S.S. Ragavachar. Mysore: Sri Ramakrishna Ashrama, 1968.
  • Ṛg Veda. Vedic hymns. Trans. Hermann Oldenberg. Sacred books of the East. Ed. F. Max Müller. Vol. 32, 46. 2 vols. Oxford: The Clarendon Press, 1891.
  • Śabara. Śabara Bhāṣya. Trans. Ganganatha Jha. Gaekwad's Oriental Series. Vol. 66, 70, 73. Baroda: Oriental Institute, 1933.
  • Saṃyutta Nikāya. The Connected Discourses of the Buddha : a New Translation of the Saṃyutta Nikāya; translated from the Pāli. Trans. Bhikkhu Bodhi. 2 vols. Somerville, MA: Wisdom Publications, 2000.
  • Śaṅkara (ācārya). Bhagavad Gītā with the commentary of Śankarācārya. Trans. Swāmi Gambhirānanda. Calcutta: Advaita Ashrama, 1991.
  • Śaṅkara (ācārya). “Taittitrīya Upaniṣad Bhāṣya.” Trans. Swami Gambirananda. Eight Upaniṣads, With the Commentary of Śankarācārya. Vol. 1: Advaita Ashrama, 1977. 3-29.
  • Śaṅkara (ācārya). The Vedānta Sūtras (Brahma Sūtra Bhāṣya). Sacred books of the East, vol.38. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass, 1994.
  • Śaṅkara-Misra. Vaiśeṣika Sūtra Bhāṣya. Trans. Nandalal Sinha. Sacred Books of the Hindus. Ed. Nandal Sinha. 2nd rev. and enl. ed. Vol. 6. Allahabad: Sudhindra Nath Basu, Panini Office, 1923.
  • Sūtrakṛtānga . Trans. Harmann Georg Jacobi. Jaina Sūtras. Ed. Harmann Georg Jacobi. Vol. 2. Delhi: AVF Books, 1987. 235–436.
  • Tapasyānanda, Swāmi. Bhakti Schools of Vedānta. Madras: Ramakrishna Math, 1990.
  • Udayanācārya and Haridāsa Nyāyālamkāra. The Kusumāñjali: or, Hindu Proof of the Existence of a Supreme Being (10th Century). (Udayanācārya’s Nyāyausumāñjali with Haridāsa’s Nyāyālaṃkāra’s Vyākhyā). Trans. and Ed. E.B. Cowell. Varanasi: Bharat-Bharati, 1980.
  • Vivekānanda. The Complete Works of Swami Vivekānanda. Mayavati memorial ed. Calcutta: Advaita Ashrama, 1964.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Bharadwaja, V.K. “A Non-Ethical Concept of Ahiṃsā.” Indian Philosophical Quarterly. xi.2 (1984): 171-77.
  • Chaterjee, Satischandra, and Dhirendramohan Data. An Introduction to Indian Philosophy. Calcutta: University of Calcutta, 1960.
  • Dasgupta, Surendranath. A History of Indian Philosophy. 5 vols. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidas, 1975.
  • Deutsch, Eliot. Advaita Vedānta: a Philosophical Reconstruction. 1st ed. Honolulu: East-West Center Press, 1969.
  • Dundas, Paul. The Jains. New York: Routledge, 1992.
  • Flintoff, Everard. “Pyrrho and India.” Phronesis 25 (1980): 88-106.
  • Fox, Michael W. Bringing Life to Ethics: Global Bioethics for a Humane Society. Albany: State University of New York Press, 2001.
  • Hacker, Paul. Philology and Confrontation. Ed. Wilhelm Halbfass. Albany: State Universisty of New York, 1995.
  • Halbfass, Wilhelm. India and Europe: an Essay in Understanding. Indien und Europa: Perspektiven ihrer geistigen Begegnung. Basel; Stuttgart: Schwabe, 1981. Albany, N.Y.: State University of New York Press, 1988.
  • Halbfass, Wilhelm. Tradition and Reflection: Explorations in Indian Thought. Albany, N.Y.: State University of New York Press, 1991.
  • Jha, Ganganatha. Purva Mīmāṃsā in its Sources. Trans. Jha, Ganganatha. Library of Indian Philosophy and Religion. Benares: Benares Hindu University, 1942.
  • Kane, Pandurang Vaman. History of Dharmaśāstra: Ancient and Mediæval Religious and Civil Law in India. Government Oriental Series. Class B. no. 6. 2nd rev. and enl. ed. 5 vols. Poona: Bhandarkar Oriental Research Institute, 1990.
  • Klostermaier, Klaus. “Dharmamegha samādhi: Comments on Yoga Sūtra IV.29.” Philosophy East and West 36.3 (1986:): 253-62.
  • Larson, Gerald James, and Ram Shankar Bhattacharya. Samkhya: a Dualist Tradition in Indian Philosophy. Encyclopedia of Indian Philosophies. Ed. Karl H. Potter. Vol. 4. Princeton, N.J.: Princeton University Press, 1987.
  • Monier-Williams, Monier. A Sanskrit-English Dictionary: Etymologically and Philologically Arranged, with Special Reference to Cognate Indo-European Languages. Oxford University Press 1872, enlarged 1899. “greatly enlarged and improved” ed. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass Publishers, 1995.
  • Potter, Karl H., ed. Encyclopedia of Indian Philosophies. 5 vols. Princeton NJ; Delhi: Princeton University Press; Motilal Banarsidass, 1970–1995.
  • Potter, Karl H., ed. Presuppositions of India’s Philosophies. Prentice-Hall Philosophy Series. Englewood Cliffs, N.J.: Prentice-Hall, 1963.
  • Potter, Karl H., and Sibajiban Bhattacharya. Indian Metaphysics and Epistemology: The Tradition of Nyāya–Vaiśeṣika up to Gaṅgeśa. The Encyclopedia of Indian Philosophies. Ed. Karl H. Potter. Vol. 2. Princeton NJ: Princeton University, 1977.
  • Sharma, B. N. Kṛṣṇamurti. The Brahma Sūtras and their Principal Commentaries; a Critical Exposition. 2nd ed. New Delhi: Munshiram Manoharlal, 1986.
  • Thapar, Romila. A History of India. Vol. 1. London: Penguin Books, 1990.
  • Whicher, Ian. The Integrity of the Yoga Darśana. Albany: State University of New York, 1998.

Author Information

Shyam Ranganathan
York University

Marcus Aurelius (121—180 C.E.)

aureliuThe philosophy of the Roman Emperor Marcus Aurelius can be found in a collection of personal writings known as the Meditations. These reflect the influence of Stoicism and, in particular, the philosophy of Epictetus, the Stoic. The Meditations may be read as a series of practical philosophical exercises, following Epictetus' three topics of study, designed to digest and put into practice philosophical theory. Central to these exercises is a concern with the analysis of one's judgements and a desire to cultivate a "cosmic perspective."

From a modern perspective Marcus Aurelius is certainly not in the first rank of ancient philosophers. He is no Plato or Aristotle, nor even a Sextus Empiricus or Alexander of Aphrodisias. To a certain extent this judgement is perfectly fair and reasonable. However, in order to assess the philosophical qualities that Marcus does have and that are displayed in the Meditations it is necessary to emphasize that in antiquity philosophy was not conceived merely as a matter of theoretical arguments. Such arguments existed and were important, but they were framed within a broader conception of philosophy as a way of life. The aim was not merely to gain a rational understanding of the world but to allow that rational understanding to inform the way in which one lived. If one keeps this understanding of 'philosophy' in mind, then one becomes able to appreciate the function and the philosophical value of Marcus' Meditations.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. The Meditations
  3. Philosophy
    1. Stoicism
    2. The Influence of Epictetus
    3. The Three topoi
    4. Philosophical Exercises
    5. The Point of View of the Cosmos
  4. Concluding Remarks
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Life

Marcus Aurelius was born in 121 C.E.. His early education was overseen by the Emperor Hadrian, and he was later adopted by the Emperor Antoninus Pius in 138 C.E.. After an initial education in rhetoric undertaken by Fronto, Marcus later abandoned it in favor of philosophy. Marcus became Emperor himself in AD 161, initially alongside Lucius Verus, becoming sole Emperor in AD 169. Continual attacks meant that much of his reign was spent on campaign, especially in central Europe. However, he did find time to establish four Chairs of Philosophy in Athens, one for each of the principal philosophical traditions (Platonic, Aristotelian, Stoic, andEpicurean). He died in AD 180.

2. The Meditations

Marcus' reputation as a philosopher rests upon one work, the Meditations. The Meditations take the form of a personal notebook and were probably written while Marcus was on campaign in central Europe, c. AD 171-175. The entries appear to be in no particular order and may simply be in the original order of composition. The repetition of themes and the occasional groups of quotations from other authors (see e.g. Med. 4.46, 11.33-39)add to this impression. Book One, however, is somewhat different from the rest of the text and may well have been written separately (a plan for it may be discerned in Med. 6.48).

The first recorded mention of the Meditations is by Themistius in AD 364. The current Greek title - ta eis heauton ('to himself') – derives from a manuscript now lost and may be a later addition (it is first recorded c. AD 900 by Arethas). The modern text derives primarily from two sources: a manuscript now in the Vatican and a lost manuscript (mentioned above), upon which the first printed edition (1558) was based.

Beyond the Meditations there also survives part of a correspondence between Marcus and his rhetoric teacher Fronto, probably dating from earlier in Marcus' life (c. AD 138-166), discovered as a palimpsest in 1815. However, although this interesting discovery sheds some light on Marcus as an individual, it adds little to our understanding of his philosophy.

3. Philosophy

a. Stoicism

According to tradition, Marcus was a Stoic. His ancient biographer, Julius Capitolinus, describes him as such. Marcus also makes reference to a number of Stoics by whom he was taught and, in particular, mentions Rusticus from whom he borrowed a copy of the works of the Stoic philosopher Epictetus (Med. 1.7). However, nowhere in the Meditations does Marcus explicitly call himself a Stoic. This may simply reflect the likelihood that Marcus was writing only for himself rather than attempting to define himself to an audience. Yet it is probably fair to admit that Marcus was at least open to ideas from other philosophical traditions, being impressed by Stoic philosophy, but not merely an unthinking disciple of Stoicism.

b. The Influence of Epictetus

As has been noted, Marcus was clearly familiar with the Discourses of Epictetus, quoting them a number of times (see Med. 11.33-38). Epictetus' fame in the second century is noted by a number of ancient sources, being hailed as the greatest of the Stoics (Aulus Gellius 1.2.6) and more popular than Plato (Origen Contra Celsus 6.2). If Marcus felt drawn towards Stoicism, then Epictetus would surely have stood out as the most important Stoic of the time. It is perhaps reasonable, then, to turn to Epictetus in order to explore the philosophical background to the Meditations.

c. The Three topoi

Central to Epictetus' philosophy is his account of three topoi, or areas of study. He suggests that the apprentice philosopher should be trained in three distinct areas or topoi (see Epictetus Discourses 3.2.1-2):

  1. Desires (orexeis) and aversions (ekkliseis);
  2. Impulse to act (hormas) and not to act (aphormas);
  3. Freedom from deception, hasty judgement, and anything else related to assents (sunkatatheseis).

These three areas of training correspond to the three types of philosophical discourse referred to by earlier Stoics; the physical, the ethical, and the logical (see Diogenes Laertius 7.39). For Epictetus, it is not enough merely to discourse about philosophy. The student of philosophy should also engage in practical training designed to digest philosophical principals, transforming them into actions. Only this will enable the apprentice philosopher to transform himself into the Stoic ideal of a wise person or sage (sophos). It is to this end that the three topoi are directed.

The first topos, concerning desire (orexis), is devoted to physics. It is not enough for the philosopher to know how Nature works; he must train his desires in the light of that knowledge so that he only desires what is in harmony with Nature. For the Stoic, Nature is a complex inter-connected physical system, identified with God, of which the individual is but one part. What might be called the practical implication of this conception of Nature is that an individual will inevitably become frustrated and unhappy if they desire things without taking into account the operations of this larger physical system. Thus, in order to become a Stoic sage - happy and in harmony with Nature – one must train one's desires in the light of a study of Stoic physical theory.

The second topos, concerning impulse (hormê), is devoted to ethics. The study of ethical theory is of course valuable in its own right but, for the Stoic training to be a sage, these theories must be translated into ethical actions. In order to transform the way in which one behaves, it is necessary to train the impulses that shape one's behavior. By so doing the apprentice philosopher will be able not merely to say how a sage should act but also to act as a sage should act.

The third topos, concerning assent (sunkatathesis), is devoted to logic. It is important to remember here that for the Stoics the term 'logic' included not only dialectic but also much of what one would today call epistemology. According to Epictetus every impression (phantasia) that an individual receives often includes a value-judgement (hupolêpsis) made by the individual. When an individual accepts or gives assent (sunkatathesis) to an impression, assent is often given to the value-judgement as well. For instance, when one sees someone drink a lot of wine, one often judges that they are drinking too much wine (see e.g. Epictetus Handbook 45). Epictetus suggests that, in the light of Stoic epistemological theory, the apprentice philosopher should train himself to analyze his impressions carefully and be on guard not to give assent to unwarranted value-judgements.

For Epictetus, then, the student of philosophy must not only study the three types of philosophical discourse but also engage in these three types of philosophical training or exercise in order to translate that theory into actions. Marcus may himself be seen as a student of Epictetus, and so some scholars have suggested that the three topoi form a key to understanding the Meditations. Indeed, the Meditations may be approached as an example of a form of personal writing in which the very act of writing constituted a philosophical exercise designed to digest the three types of philosophical theory. In other words, the Meditations are a text produced by someone engaged in the three topoi outlined by Epictetus. This is hinted at in Med. 9.7 where Marcus exhorts himself to 'wipe out impression (phantasia), check impulse (hormê), and quench desire (orexis)'.

d. Philosophical Exercises

The Meditations certainly do not present philosophical theories similar to those that one can find in, say, the surviving works of Aristotle. Nor are they comparable to a theoretical treatise like the Elements of Ethics by the Stoic Hierocles, possibly a contemporary of Marcus. Nevertheless, the Meditations remain essentially a philosophical text. As has already been noted, the Meditations are a personal notebook, written by Marcus to himself and for his own use. They do not form a theoretical treatise designed to argue for a particular doctrine or conclusion; their function is different. In order to understand this function it is necessary to introduce the idea of a philosophical exercise (askêsis).

In the Meditations Marcus engages in a series of philosophical exercises designed to digest philosophical theories, to transform his character or 'dye his soul' in the light of those theories (see e.g. Med. 5.16), and so to transform his behavior and his entire way of life. By reflecting upon philosophical ideas and, perhaps more importantly, writing them down, Marcus engages in a repetitive process designed to habituate his mind into a new way of thinking. This procedure is quite distinct from the construction of philosophical arguments and has a quite different function. Whereas the former is concerned with creating a particular philosophical doctrine, the latter is a practical exercise or training designed to assimilate that doctrine into one's habitual modes of behavior. Following the account of three types of philosophical training outlined by Epictetus, Marcus reflects in the Meditations upon a medley of physical, ethical, and logical ideas. These written reflections constitute a second stage of philosophical education necessary after one has studied the philosophical theories (see e.g. Epictetus Discourses 1.26.3). By engaging in such written philosophical exercises Marcus attempts to transform his soul or inner disposition that will, in turn, alter his behavior. Thus, this second stage of philosophical education is the process by which a philosophical apprentice trains himself to put theories into practice, and so make progress towards wisdom.

e. The Point of View of the Cosmos

Of all the philosophical exercises in the Meditations the most prominent centers around what might be called 'the point of view of the cosmos'. In a number of passages Marcus exhorts himself to overcome the limited perspective of the individual and experience the world from a cosmic perspective. For example:

You have the power to strip away many superfluous troubles located wholly in your judgement, and to possess a large room for yourself embracing in thought the whole cosmos, to consider everlasting time, to think of the rapid change in the parts of each thing, of how short it is from birth until dissolution, and how the void before birth and that after dissolution are equally infinite. (Med. 9.32; see also 2.17, 5.23, 7.47, 12.32)

In passages such as this Marcus makes implicit reference to a number of Stoic theories. Here, for instance, the Stoic physics of flux inherited from Heraclitus is evoked. Perhaps more important though is the reference to one's judgement and the claim that this is the source of human unhappiness. Following Epictetus, Marcus claims that all attributions of good or evil are the product of human judgements. As Epictetus put it, what upsets people are not things themselves but rather their judgements about things (see Handbook 5). According to Epictetus' epistemological theory (to the extent that it can be reconstructed) the impressions that an individual receives and that appear to reflect the nature of things are in fact already composite. They involve not only a perception of some external object but also an almost involuntary and unconscious judgement about that perception. This judgement will be a product of one's preconceptions and mental habits. It is this composite impression to which an individual grants or denies assent, creating a belief. The task for the philosopher is to subject one's impressions to rigorous examination, making sure that one does not give assent to (i.e. accept as true) impressions that include any unwarranted value judgements.

Marcus' personal reflections in the Meditations may be read as a series of written exercises aimed at analyzing his own impressions and rejecting his own unwarranted value judgements. For instance, he reminds himself:

Do not say more to yourself than the first impressions report. […] Abide always by the first impressions and add nothing of your own from within. (Med. 8.49)

These 'first impressions' are impressions before a value judgement has been made. For Marcus, human well-being or happiness (eudaimonia) is entirely dependent upon correctly examining one's impressions and judgements. For once one has overcome false value-judgements - that wealth and social standing are valuable and that one should compete for them against others, for instance –one will experience the cosmos as a single living being (identified with God) rather than a site of conflict and destruction. As Cicero put it in his summary of Stoic physics:

The various limited modes of being may encounter many external obstacles to hinder their perfect realization, but there can be nothing that can frustrate Nature as a whole, since she embraces and contains within herself all modes of being. (On the Nature of the Gods 2.35)

It is to this end - cultivating an experience of the cosmos as a unified living being identified with God– that the philosophical exercises in the Meditations are directed.

4. Concluding Remarks

From a modern perspective Marcus Aurelius is certainly not in the first rank of ancient philosophers. He is no Plato or Aristotle, nor even a Sextus Empiricus or Alexander of Aphrodisias. To a certain extent this judgement is perfectly fair and reasonable. However, in order to assess the philosophical qualities that Marcus does have and that are displayed in the Meditations it is necessary to emphasize that in antiquity philosophy was not conceived merely as a matter of theoretical arguments. Such arguments existed and were important, but they were framed within a broader conception of philosophy as a way of life. The aim was not merely to gain a rational understanding of the world but to allow that rational understanding to inform the way in which one lived. If one keeps this understanding of 'philosophy' in mind, then one becomes able to appreciate the function and the philosophical value of Marcus' Meditations.

5. References and Further Reading

1. Selected Editions and Translations of the Meditations

  • CROSSLEY, H., The Fourth Book of the Meditations of Marcus Aurelius Antoninus, A Revised Text with Translation and Commentary (London: Macmillan, 1882) - an excellent commentary, sadly of only one book.
  • DALFEN, J., Marci Aurelii Antonini Ad Se Ipsum Libri XII, Bibliotheca Scriptorum Graecorum et Romanorum Teubneriana (Leipzig: Teubner, 1979; 2nd edn 1987) - includes an invaluable word index.
  • FARQUHARSON, A. S. L., The Meditations of the Emperor Marcus Antoninus, Edited with Translation and Commentary, 2 vols (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1944) - arguably the definitive edition and essential for any serious study of the Meditations.
  • FARQUHARSON, A. S. L.,The Meditations of Marcus Aurelius Antoninus, With Introduction and Notes by R. B. Rutherford (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1989) - an edition reprinting only the translation from Farquharson's 1944 edition, but supplemented with a helpful introduction and a selection from the correspondence with Fronto.
  • GATAKER, T., Marci Antonini Imperatoris de rebus suis, sive de eis qae ad se pertinere censebat, Libri XII (Cambridge: Thomas Buck, 1652) - a justly famous early edition of the Meditations containing a substantial commentary.
  • HAINES, C. R., The Communings with Himself of Marcus Aurelius Antoninus, A Revised Text and a Translation into English, The Loeb Classical Library (London: Heinemann, 1916; later reprints by Harvard University Press) - probably the most readily available edition of the Greek text, with a facing English translation. Haines also prepared a two-volume edition of the correspondence with Fronto for the Loeb Classical Library.
  • LEOPOLD, I. H., M. Antoninus Imperator Ad Se Ipsum, Scriptorum Classicorum Bibliotheca Oxoniensis (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1908) - the OCT edition, now out of print.
  • THEILER, W., Kaiser Marc Aurel, Wege Zu Sich Selbst (Zürich: Artemis, 1951) - a widely praised edition of the Greek text, with a facing German translation.

2. Selected Studies

  • AFRICA, T. W., 'The Opium Addiction of Marcus Aurelius', Journal of the History of Ideas 22 (1961), 97-102.
  • ARNOLD, E. V., Roman Stoicism: Being Lectures on the History of the Stoic Philosophy with Special Reference to its Development within the Roman Empire (Cambridge, 1911; repr. London: Routledge & Kegan Paul, 1958)
  • ASMIS, E., 'The Stoicism of Marcus Aurelius', ANRW II 36.3 (1989), pp. 2228-2252.
  • BIRLEY, A. R., Marcus Aurelius: A Biography (London: Batsford, 1966; new edn Routledge 2000)
  • BRUNT, P. A., 'Marcus Aurelius in his Meditations', Journal of Roman Studies 64 (1974), 1-20.
  • CLARKE, M. L., The Roman Mind: Studies in the History of Thought from Cicero to Marcus Aurelius (London: Cohen & West, 1956)
  • HADOT, P., 'Une clé des Pensées de Marc Aurèle: les trois topoi philosophiques selon Épictète', Les Études philosophiques 1 (1978), 65-83.
  • HADOT, P., The Inner Citadel: The Meditations of Marcus Aurelius, trans. M. Chase (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1998); a translation of La Citadelle Intérieure (Paris, 1992)
  • KRAYE, J., 'Ethnicorum omnium sanctissimus: Marcus Aurelius and his Meditations from Xylander to Diderot', in J. Kraye & M. W. F. Stones, eds, Humanism and Early Modern Philosophy (London: Routledge, 2000), pp. 107-134.
  • LONG, A. A., 'Epictetus, Marcus Aurelius', in T. J. Luce, ed., Ancient Writers: Greece and Rome (New York: Scribner's, 1982), pp. 985-1002.
  • MORFORD, M., The Roman Philosophers: From the Time of Cato the Censor to the Death of Marcus Aurelius (London: Routledge, 2002)
  • NEWMAN, R. J., 'Cotidie meditare: Theory and Practice of the meditatio in Imperial Stoicism', ANRW II 36.3 (1989), pp. 1473-1517.
  • RIST, J. M., 'Are You a Stoic? The Case of Marcus Aurelius', in B. F. Meyers & E. P. Sanders, eds, Jewish and Christian Self-Definition 3 (London: SCM, 1982), pp. 23-45.
  • RUTHERFORD, R. B., The Meditations of Marcus Aurelius: A Study (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1989)
  • STANTON, G. R., 'The Cosmopolitan Ideas of Epictetus and Marcus Aurelius', Phronesis 13 (1968), 183-195.
  • WICKHAM LEGG, J., 'A Bibliography of the Thoughts of Marcus Aurelius Antoninus', Transactions of the Bibliographical Society 10 (1908-09, but publ. 1910), 15-81.

Author Information

John Sellars
Email: john.sellars (at)
University of the West of England
United Kingdom


Neo-platonism (or Neoplatonism) is a modern term used to designate the period of Platonic philosophy beginning with the work of Plotinus and ending with the closing of the Platonic Academy by the Emperor Justinian in 529 C.E. This brand of Platonism, which is often described as 'mystical' or religious in nature, developed outside the mainstream of Academic Platonism. The origins of Neoplatonism can be traced back to the era of Hellenistic syncretism which spawned such movements and schools of thought as Gnosticism and the Hermetic tradition. A major factor in this syncretism, and one which had an immense influence on the development of Platonic thought, was the introduction of the Jewish Scriptures into Greek intellectual circles via the translation known as the Septuagint. The encounter between the creation narrative of Genesis and the cosmology of Plato's Timaeus set in motion a long tradition of cosmological theorizing that finally culminated in the grand schema of Plotinus' Enneads. Plotinus' two major successors, Porphyry and Iamblichus, each developed, in their own way, certain isolated aspects of Plotinus' thought, but neither of them developed a rigorous philosophy to match that of their master. It was Proclus who, shortly before the closing of the Academy, bequeathed a systematic Platonic philosophy upon the world that in certain ways approached the sophistication of Plotinus. Finally, in the work of the so-called Pseudo-Dionysius, we find a grand synthesis of Platonic philosophy and Christian theology that was to exercise an immense influence on mediaeval mysticism and Renaissance Humanism.

Table of Contents

  1. What is Neoplatonism?
  2. Plotinian Neoplatonism
    1. Contemplation and Creation
    2. Nature and Personality
    3. Salvation and the Cosmic Process
      1. Plotinus' Last Words
    4. The Achievement of Plotinus
      1. The Plotinian Synthesis
  3. Porphyry and Iamblichus
    1. The Nature of the Soul
      1. The (re)turn to Astrology
    2. The Quest for Transcendence
      1. Theurgy and the Distrust of Dialectic
  4. Proclus and Pseudo-Dionysius
    1. Being -- Becoming -- Being
    2. The God Beyond Being
  5. Appendix: The Renaissance Platonists
  6. References and Further Reading

1. What is Neoplatonism?

The term 'Neoplatonism' is a modern construction. Plotinus, who is often considered the 'founder' of Neoplatonism, would not have considered himself a "new" Platonist in any sense, but simply an expositor of the doctrines of Plato. That this required him to formulate an entirely new philosophical system would not have been viewed by him as a problem, for it was, in his eyes, precisely what the Platonic doctrine required. In a sense, this is true, for as early as the Old Academy we find Plato's successors struggling with the proper interpretation of his thought, and arriving at strikingly different conclusions. Also, in the Hellenistic era, certain Platonic ideas were taken up by thinkers of various loyalties -- Jewish, Gnostic, Christian -- and worked up into new forms of expression that varied quite considerably from what Plato actually wrote in his Dialogues. Should this lead us to the conclusion that these thinkers were any less 'loyal' to Plato than were the members of the Academy (in its various forms throughout the centuries preceding Plotinus)? No; for the multiple and often contradictory uses made of Platonic ideas is a testament to the universality of Plato's thought -- that is, its ability to admit of a wide variety of interpretations and applications. In this sense, Neo-Platonism may be said to have begun immediately after Plato's death, when new approaches to his philosophy were being broached. Indeed, we already see a hint, in the doctrines of Xenocrates (the second head of the Old Academy) of a type of salvation theory involving the unification of the two parts of the human soul -- the "Olympian" or heavenly, and the "Titanic" or earthly (Dillon 1977, p. 27). If we accept Frederick Copleston's description of Neoplatonism as "the intellectualist reply to the ... yearning for personal salvation" (Copleston 1962, p. 216) we can already locate the beginning of this reply as far back as the Old Academy, and Neoplatonism would then not have begun with Plotinus. However, it is not clear that Xenocrates' idea of salvation involved the individual; it is quite possible that he was referring to a unified human nature in an abstract sense. In any case, the early Hermetic-Gnostic tradition is certainly to an extent Platonic, and later Gnosticism and Christian Logos theology markedly so. If an intellectual reply to a general yearning for personal salvation is what characterizes Neoplatonism, then the highly intellectual Gnostics and Christians of the Late Hellenistic era must be given the title of Neoplatonists. However, if we are to be rigorous and define Neoplatonism as the synthesis of various more or less 'Platonistic' ideas into a grand expression of Platonic philosophy, then Plotinus must be considered the founder of Neoplatonism. Yet we must not forget that these Platonizing Christian, Gnostic, Jewish, and other 'pagan' thinkers provided the necessary speculative material to make this synthesis possible.

2. Plotinian Neoplatonism

The great third century thinker and 'founder' of Neoplatonism, Plotinus, is responsible for the grand synthesis of progressive Christian and Gnostic ideas with the traditional Platonic philosophy. He answered the challenge of accounting for the emergence of a seemingly inferior and flawed cosmos from the perfect mind of the divinity by declaring outright that all objective existence is but the external self-expression of an inherently contemplative deity known as the One (to hen), or the Good (ta kalon). Plotinus compares the expression of the superior godhead with the self-expression of the individual soul, which proceeds from the perfect conception of a Form (eidos), to the always flawed expression of this Form in the manner of a materially derived 'personality' that risks succumbing to the demands of divisive discursivity, and so becomes something less than divine. This diminution of the divine essence in temporality is but a necessary moment of the complete expression of the One. By elevating the experience of the individual soul to the status of an actualization of a divine Form, Plotinus succeeded, also, in preserving, if not the autonomy, at least the dignity and ontological necessity of personality. The Cosmos, according to Plotinus, is not a created order, planned by a deity on whom we can pass the charge of begetting evil; for the Cosmos is the self-expression of the Soul, which corresponds, roughly, to Philo's logos prophorikos, the logos endiathetos of which is the Intelligence (nous). Rather, the Cosmos, in Plotinian terms, is to be understood as the concrete result or 'product' of the Soul's experience of its own Mind (nous). Ideally, this concrete expression should serve the Soul as a reference-point for its own self-conscious existence; however, the Soul all too easily falls into the error of valuing the expression over the principle (arkhê), which is the contemplation of the divine Forms. This error gives rise to evil, which is the purely subjective relation of the Soul (now divided) to the manifold and concrete forms of its expressive act. When the Soul, in the form of individual existents, becomes thus preoccupied with its experience, Nature comes into being, and the Cosmos takes on concrete form as the locus of personality.

a. Contemplation and Creation

Hearkening back, whether consciously or not, to the doctrine of Speusippus (Plato's successor in the Academy) that the One is utterly transcendent and "beyond being," and that the Dyad is the true first principle (Dillon 1977, p. 12), Plotinus declares that the One is "alone with itself" and ineffable (cf. Enneads VI.9.6 and V.2.1). The One does not act to produce a cosmos or a spiritual order, but simply generates from itself, effortlessly, a power (dunamis) which is at once the Intellect (nous) and the object of contemplation (theôria) of this Intellect. While Plotinus suggests that the One subsists by thinking itself as itself, the Intellect subsists through thinking itself as other, and therefore becomes divided within itself: this act of division within the Intellect is the production of Being, which is the very principle of expression or discursivity (Ennead V.1.7). For this reason, the Intellect stands as Plotinus' sole First Principle. At this point, the thinking or contemplation of the Intellect is divided up and ordered into thoughts, each of them subsisting in and for themselves, as autonomous reflections of the dunamis of the One. These are the Forms (eidê), and out of their inert unity there arises the Soul, whose task it is to think these Forms discursively and creatively, and to thereby produce or create a concrete, living expression of the divine Intellect. This activity of the Soul results in the production of numerous individual souls: living actualizations of the possibilities inherent in the Forms. Whereas the Intellect became divided within itself through contemplation, the Soul becomes divided outside of itself, through action (which is still contemplation, according to Plotinus, albeit the lowest type; cf. Ennead III.8.4), and this division constitutes the Cosmos, which is the expressive or creative act of the Soul, also referred to as Nature. When the individual soul reflects upon Nature as its own act, this soul is capable of attaining insight (gnôsis) into the essence of Intellect; however, when the soul views nature as something objective and external -- that is, as something to be experienced or undergone, while forgetting that the soul itself is the creator of this Nature -- evil and suffering ensue. Let us now examine the manner in which Plotinus explains Nature as the locus of personality.

b. Nature and Personality

Contemplation, at the level of the Soul, is for Plotinus a two-way street. The Soul both contemplates, passively, the Intellect, and reflects upon its own contemplative act by producing Nature and the Cosmos. The individual souls that become immersed in Nature, as moments of the Soul's eternal act, will, ideally, gain a complete knowledge of the Soul in its unity, and even of the Intellect, by reflecting upon the concrete results of the Soul's act -- that is, upon the externalized, sensible entities that comprise the physical Cosmos. This reflection, if carried by the individual soul with a memory of its provenance always in the foreground, will lead to a just governing of the physical Cosmos, which will make of it a perfect material image of the Intellectual Cosmos, i.e., the realm of the Forms (cf. Enneads IV.3.7 and IV.8.6). However, things don't always turn out so well, for individual souls often "go lower than is needful ... in order to light the lower regions, but it is not good for them to go so far" (Ennead IV.3.17, tr. O'Brien 1964). For when the soul extends itself ever farther into the indeterminacy of materiality, it gradually loses memory of its divine origin, and comes to identify itself more and more with its surroundings -- that is to say: the soul identifies itself with the results of the Soul's act, and forgets that it is, as part of this Soul, itself an agent of the act. This is tantamount to a relinquishing, by the soul, of its divine nature. When the soul has thus abandoned itself, it begins to accrue many alien encrustations, if you will, that make of it something less than divine. These encrustations are the 'accidents' (in the Aristotelian sense) of personality. And yet the soul is never completely lost, for, as Plotinus insists, the soul need simply "think upon essential being" in order to return to itself, and continue to exist authentically as a governor of the Cosmos (Ennead IV.8.4-6). The memory of the personality that this wandering soul possessed must be forgotten in order for it to return completely to its divine nature; for if it were remembered, we would have to say, contradictorily, that the soul holds a memory of what occurred during its state of forgetfulness! So in a sense, Plotinus holds that individual personalities are not maintained at the level of Soul. However, if we understand personality as more than just a particular attitude attached to a concrete mode of existence, and rather view it as the sum total of experiences reflected upon in intellect, then souls most certainly retain their personalities, even at the highest level, for they persist as thoughts within the divine Mind (cp. Ennead IV.8.5). The personality that one acquires in action (the lowest type of contemplation) is indeed forgotten and dissolved, but the 'personality' or persistence in intellect that one achieves through virtuous acts most definitely endures (Ennead IV.3.32).

c. Salvation and the Cosmic Process

Plotinus, like his older contemporary, the Christian philosopher Origen of Alexandria, views the descent of the soul into the material realm as a necessary moment in the unfolding of the divine Intellect, or God. For this reason, the descent itself is not an evil, for it is a reflection of God's essence. Both Origen and Plotinus place the blame for experiencing this descent as an evil squarely upon the individual soul. Of course, these thinkers held, respectively, quite different views as to why and how the soul experiences the descent as an evil; but they held one thing in common: that the rational soul will naturally choose the Good, and that any failure to do so is the result of forgetfulness or acquired ignorance. But whence this failure? Origen gave what, to Plotinus' mind, must have been a quite unsatisfactory answer: that souls pre-existed as spiritual beings, and when they desired to create or 'beget' independently of God, they all fell into error, and languished there until the coming of Logos Incarnate. This view has more than a little Gnostic flavor to it, which would have sat ill with Plotinus, who was a great opponent of Gnosticism. The fall of the soul Plotinus refers, quite simply, to the tension between pure contemplation and divisive action -- a tension that constitutes the natural mode of existence of the soul (cf. Ennead IV.8.6-7). Plotinus tells us that a thought is only completed or fully comprehended after it has been expressed, for only then can the thought be said to have passed from potentiality to actuality (Ennead IV.3.30). The question of whether Plotinus places more value on the potential or the actual is really of no consequence, for in the Plotinian plêrôma every potentiality generates an activity, and every activity becomes itself a potential for new activity (cf. Ennead III.8.8); and since the One, which is the goal or object of desire of all existents, is neither potentiality nor actuality, but "beyond being" (epekeina ousias), it is impossible to say whether the striving of existents, in Plotinus' schema, will result in full and complete actualization, or in a repose of potentiality that will make them like their source. "Likeness to God as far as possible," for Plotinus, is really likeness to oneself -- authentic existence. Plotinus leaves it up to the individual to determine what this means.

i. Plotinus' Last Words

In his biography of Plotinus, Porphyry records the last words of his teacher to his students as follows: "Strive to bring back the god in yourselves to the God in the All" (Porphyry, Life of Plotinus 2, my translation). After uttering these words, Plotinus, one of the greatest philosophers the world has ever known, passed away. The simplicity of this final statement seems to be at odds with the intellectual rigors of Plotinus' treatises, which challenge -- and more often than not vanquish -- just about every prominent philosophical view of the era. But this is only if we take this remark in a mystical or ecstatic religious sense. Plotinus demanded the utmost level of intellectual clarity in dealing with the problem of humankind's relation to the highest principle of existence. Striving for or desiring salvation was not, for Plotinus, an excuse for simply abandoning oneself to faith or prayer or unreflective religious rituals; rather, salvation was to be achieved through the practice of philosophical investigation, of dialectic. The fact that Plotinus, at the end of his life, had arrived at this very simple formulation, serves to show that his dialectical quest was successful. In his last treatise, "On the Primal Good" (Ennead I.7), Plotinus is able to assert, in the same breath, that both life and death are good. He says this because life is the moment in which the soul expresses itself and revels in the autonomy of the creative act. However, this life, since it is characterized by action, eventually leads to exhaustion, and the desire, not for autonomous action, but for reposeful contemplation -- of a fulfillment that is purely intellectual and eternal. Death is the relief of this exhaustion, and the return to a state of contemplative repose. Is this return to the Intellect a return to potentiality? It is hard to say. Perhaps it is a synthesis of potentiality and actuality: the moment at which the soul is both one and many, both human and divine. This would constitute Plotinian salvation -- the fulfillment of the exhortation of the dying sage.

d. The Achievement of Plotinus

In the last analysis, what stands as the most important and impressive accomplishment of Plotinus is the manner in which he synthesized the pure, 'semi-mythical' expression of Plato with the logical rigors of the Peripatetic and Stoic schools, yet without losing sight of philosophy's most important task: of rendering the human experience in intelligible and analyzable terms. That Plotinus' thought had to take the 'detour' through such wildly mystical and speculative paths as Gnosticism and Christian salvation theology is only proof of his clear-sightedness, thoroughness, and admirable humanism. For all of his dialectical difficulties and perambulations, Plotinus' sole concern is with the well-being (eudaimonia) of the human soul. This is, of course, to be understood as an intellectual, as opposed to a merely physical or even emotional well-being, for Plotinus was not concerned with the temporary or the temporal. The striving of the human mind for a mode of existence more suited to its intuited potential than the ephemeral possibilities of this material realm, while admittedly a striving born of temporality, is nonetheless directed toward atemporal and divine perfection. This is a striving or desire rendered all the more poignant and worthy of philosophy precisely because it is born in the depths of existential angst, and not in the primitive ecstasies of unreflective ritual. As the last true representative of the Greek philosophical spirit, Plotinus is Apollonian, not Dionysian. His concern is with the intellectual beautification of the human soul, and for this reason his notion of salvation does not, like Origen's, imply an eternal state of objective contemplation of the divinity -- for Plotinus, the separation between human and god breaks down, so that when the perfected soul contemplates itself, it is also contemplating the Supreme.

i. The Plotinian Synthesis

Plotinus was faced with the task of defending the true Platonic philosophy, as he understood it, against the inroads being made, in his time, most of all by Gnostics, but also by orthodox Christianity. Instead of launching an all-out attack on these new ideas, Plotinus took what was best from them, in his eyes, and brought these ideas into concert with his own brand of Platonism. For this reason, we are sometimes surprised to see Plotinus, in one treatise, speaking of the cosmos as a realm of forgetfulness and error, while in another, speaking of the cosmos as the most perfect expression of the godhead. Once we realize the extent to which certain Gnostic sects went in order to brand this world as a product of an evil and malignant Demiurge, to whom we owe absolutely no allegiance, it becomes clear that Plotinus was simply trying to temper the extreme form of an idea which he himself shared, though in a less radical sense. The feeling of being thrown into a hostile and alien world is a philosophically valid position from which to begin a critique and investigation of human existence; indeed, modern existentialist philosophers have often started from this same premise. However, Plotinus realized that it is not the nature of the human soul to simply escape from a realm of active engagement with external reality (the cosmos) to a passive receptance of divine form (within the plêrôma). The Soul, as Plotinus understands it, is an essentially creative being, and one which understands existence on its own terms. One of the beauties of Plotinus' system is that everything he says concerning the nature of the Cosmos (spiritual and physical) can equally be held of the Soul. Now while it would be false to charge Plotinus with solipsism (or even narcissism, as one prominent commentator has done; cf. Julia Kristeva in Hadot 1993, p. 11), it would be correct to say that the entire Cosmos is an analogue of the experience of the Soul, which results in the attainment of full self-consciousness. The form of Plotinus' system is the very form by which the Soul naturally comes to know itself in relation to its acts; and the expression of the Soul will always, therefore, be a philosophical expression. When we speak of the Plotinian synthesis, then, what we are speaking of is a natural dialectic of the Soul, which takes its own expressions into account, no matter how faulty or incomplete they may appear in retrospect, and weaves them into a cosmic tapestry of noetic images.

3. Porphyry and Iamblichus

Porphyry of Tyre (ca. 233-305 CE) is the most famous pupil of Plotinus. In addition to writing an introductory summary of his master's theories (the treatise entitled Launching-Points to the Realm of Mind), Porphyry also composed the famous Isagoge, an introduction to the Categories of Aristotle, which came to exercise an immense influence on Mediaeval Scholasticism. The extent of Porphyry's investigative interests exceeded that of his teacher, and his so-called "scientific" works, which survive to this day, include a treatise on music (On Prosody), and two studies of the astronomical and astrological theories of Claudius Ptolemy (ca. 70-140 CE), On the Harmonics, and an Introduction to The Astronomy of Ptolemy. He wrote biographies of Pythagoras and Plotinus, and edited and compiled the latter's essays into six books, each containing nine treatises, giving them the title Enneads. Unlike Plotinus, Porphyry was interested primarily in the practical aspect of salvific striving, and the manner in which the soul could most effectively bring about its transference to ever higher realms of existence. This led Porphyry to develop a doctrine of ascent to the Intellect by way of the exercise of virtue (aretê) in the form of 'good works'. This doctrine may owe its genesis to Porphyry's supposed early adherence to Christianity, as attested by the historian Socrates, and suggested by St. Augustine (cf. Copleston 1962, p. 218). If Porphyry had, at some point, been a Christian, this would account for his belief in the soul's objective relation to the divine Mind -- an idea shared by Origen, whom Porphyry knew as a youth (cf. Eusebius, The History of the Church, p. 195) -- and would explain his quite un-Plotinian belief in a gradual progress toward perfection, as opposed to the 'instant salvation' proposed by Plotinus (cf. Ennead IV.8.4).

Iamblichus of Apamea (d. ca. 330 CE) was a student of Porphyry. He departed from his teacher on more than a few points, most notably in his insistence on demoting Plotinus' One (which Porphyry left unscathed, as it were) to the level of kosmos noêtos, which according to Iamblichus generates the intellectual realm (kosmos noêros). In this regard, Iamblichus can be said to have either severely misunderstood, or neglected to even attempt to understand, Plotinus on the important doctrine of contemplation (see above). This view led Iamblichus to posit a Supreme One even higher than the One of Plotinus, which generates the Intellectual Cosmos, and yet remains beyond all predication and determinacy. Iamblichus also made a tripartite division of Soul, positing a cosmic or All-Soul, and two lesser souls, corresponding to the rational and irrational faculties, respectively. This somewhat gratuitous skewing of the Plotinian noetic realm also led Iamblichus to posit an array of intermediate spiritual beings between the lower souls and the intelligible realm -- daemons, the souls of heroes, and angels of all sorts. By placing so much distance between the earthly soul and the intelligible realm, Iamblichus made it difficult for the would-be philosopher to gain an intuitive knowledge of the higher Soul, although he insisted that everyone possesses such knowledge, coupled with an innate desire for the Good. In place of the vivid dialectic of Plotinus, Iamblichus established the practice of theurgy (theourgia), which he insists does not draw the gods down to man, but rather renders humankind, "who through generation are born subject to passion, pure and unchangeable" (On the Mysteries I.12.42; in Fowden 1986, p. 133). Whereas "likeness to God" had meant, for Plotinus, a recollection and perfection of one's own divine nature (which is, in the last analysis, identical to nous; cf. Ennead III.4), for Iamblichus the relation of humankind to the divine is one of subordinate to superior, and so the pagan religious piety that Plotinus had scorned -- "Let the gods come to me, and not I to them," he had once said (cf. Porphyry, Life of Plotinus 10) -- returns to philosophy with a vengeance. Iamblichus is best known for his lengthy treatise On the Mysteries. Like Porphyry, he also wrote a biography of Pythagoras.

a. The Nature of the Soul

In his introduction to the philosophy of Plotinus, entitled Launching-Points to the Realm of Mind, Porphyry remarks that the inclination of the incorporeal Soul toward corporeality "constitutes a second nature [the irrational soul], which unites with the body" (Launching-Points 18 [1]). This remark is supposedly a commentary on Ennead IV.2, where Plotinus discusses the relation of the individual soul to the All-Soul. While it is true that Plotinus often speaks of the individual soul as being independent of the highest Soul, he does this for illustrative purposes, in order to show how far into forgetfulness the soul that has become enamored of its act may fall. Yet Plotinus insists time and again that the individual soul and the All-Soul are one (cf. esp. Ennead IV.1), and that Nature is the Soul's expressive act (see above). Irrationality does not constitute, for Plotinus, a "second nature," but is merely a flawed exercise of rationality -- that is, doxa untempered by epistêmê -- on the part of the individual soul. Furthermore, the individual soul, which comes to unite with corporeality, governs and controls the body, making possible discursive knowledge as well as sense-perception. Uncontrolled pathos is what Plotinus calls irrationality; the soul brings aisthêsis (perceptive judgment) to corporeality, and so prevents it from sinking into irrational passivity. So what led Porphyry to make such an interpretative error, if error it was? It is quite possible that Porphyry had arrived at his own conclusions about the Soul, and tried to square his own theory with what Plotinus actually taught. One clue to the reason for the 'misunderstanding' may possibly lie in Porphyry's early involvement with Christianity. While Porphyry himself never tells us that he had been a Christian, Augustine speaks of him as if he were an apostate, and the historian Socrates states outright that Porphyry had once been of the Christian faith, telling us that he left the fold in disgust after being assaulted by a rowdy band of Christians in Caesarea (Copleston 1962, p. 218). In any case, it is certain that he was acquainted with Plotinus' older contemporary, the Christian Origen, and that he had been exposed to Christian doctrine. Indeed, his own spirited attack on Christianity ("Fifteen Arguments Against the Christians," now preserved only in fragments) shows him to have possessed a wide knowledge of Holy Scripture, remarkable for a 'pagan' philosopher of that era. Porphyry's exposure to Christian doctrine, then, would have left him with a view of salvation quite different from that of Plotinus, who seems never to have paid Christianity much mind. The best evidence we have for this explanation is Porphyry's own theory of salvation -- and it is remarkably similar to what we find in Origen! Porphyry's salvation theory is dependent, like Origen's, on a notion of the soul's objective relation to God, and its consequent striving, not to actualize its own divine potentiality, but to attain a level of virtue that makes it capable of partaking fully of the divine essence. This is accomplished through the exercise of virtue, which sets the soul on a gradual course of progress toward the highest Good. Beginning with simple 'practical virtues' (politikai arêtai) the soul gradually rises to higher levels, eventually attaining what Porphyry calls the paradeigmatikai arêtai or 'exemplary virtues' which make of the soul a living expression of the divine Mind (cf. Porphyry, Letter to Marcella 29). Note that Porphyry stops the soul's ascent at nous, and presumably holds that the 'saved' soul will eternally contemplate the infinite power of the One. If Porphyry's concern had been with the preservation of personality, then this explanation makes some sense. However, it is more likely that the true reason for Porphyry's rejection of the radically 'hubristic' theory (at least to pietistic pagans) of the nature of the individual soul held by Plotinus was a result of his intention to restore dignity to the traditional religion of the Greeks (which had come under attack not only by Plotinus, but by Christians as well). Evidence of such a program resides in Porphyry's allegorical interpretations of Homer and traditional cultic practice, as well as his possibly apologetic work on Philosophy from Oracles (now lost). Compared to Plotinus, then, Porphyry was quite the conservative, concerned as he was with maintaining the ancient view of humankind's relatively humble position in the cosmic hierarchy, over against Plotinus' view that the soul is a god, owing little more than a passing nod to its 'noble brethren' in the heavens.

i. The (re)turn to Astrology

One of the results of Porphyry's conservative position toward traditional religious practice and belief was the 'return' to the doctrine that the stars and planets are capable of affecting and ordering human life. Plotinus argued that since the individual soul is one with the All-Soul, it is in essence a co-creator of the Cosmos, and therefore not really subject to the laws governing the Cosmos -- for the soul is the source and agent of those laws! Therefore, a belief in astrology was, for Plotinus, absurd, since if the soul turned to beings dependent upon its own law -- i.e., the stars and planets -- in order to know itself, then it would only end up knowing aspects of its own act, and would never return to itself in full self-consciousness. Furthermore, as we have seen, Plotinian salvation was instantly available to the soul, if only it would turn its mind to "essential being" (see above); because of this, Plotinus saw no reason to bring the stars and planets into the picture. For Porphyry, however, who believed that the soul must gradually work toward salvation, a knowledge of the operations of the heavenly bodies and their relation to humankind would have been an important tool in gaining ever higher levels of virtue. In fact, Porphyry seems to have held the view that the soul receives certain "powers" from each of the planets -- right judgment from Saturn, proper exercise of the will from Jupiter, impulse from Mars, opinion and imagination from the Sun, and (what else?) sensuous desire from Venus; from the Moon the soul receives the power of physical production (cf. Hegel, p. 430) -- and that these powers enable to the soul to know things both earthly and heavenly. This theoretical knowledge of the powers of the planets, then, would have made the more practical knowledge of astrology quite useful and meaningful for an individual soul seeking to know itself as such. The usefulness of astrology for Porphyry, in this regard, probably resided in its ability to permit an individual, through an analysis of his birth chart, to know which planet -- and therefore which "power" -- exercised the dominant influence on his life. In keeping with the ancient Greek doctrine of the "golden mean," the task of the individual would then be to work to bring to the fore those other "powers" -- each present to a lesser degree in the soul, but still active -- and thereby achieve a balance or sôphrosunê that would render the soul more capable of sharing in the divine Mind. The art of astrology, it must be remembered, was in wide practice in the Hellenistic world, and Plotinus' rejection of it was an exception that was by no means the rule. Plotinus' views on astrology apparently found few adherents, even among Platonists, for we see not only Porphyry, but also (to an extent) Iamblichus and even Proclus declaring its value -- the latter being responsible for a paraphrase of Claudius Ptolemy's astrological compendium known as the Tetrabiblos or sometimes simply as The Astronomy. In addition to penning a commentary on Ptolemy's tome, Porphyry also wrote his own Introduction to Astronomy (by which is apparently meant "Astrology," the modern distinction not holding in Hellenistic times). Unfortunately, this work no longer survives intact.

(For more on this topic, see Hellenistic Astrology.)

b. The Quest for Transcendence

The philosophy of Plotinus was highly discursive, meaning that it operated on the assumption that the highest meaning, the most profound truth (even a so-called mystical truth) is translatable, necessarily, into language; and furthermore, that any and every experience only attains its full value as meaning when it has reached expression in the form of language. This idea, of course, placed the One always beyond the discursive understanding of the human soul, since the One was proclaimed, by Plotinus, to be not only beyond discursive knowledge, but also the very source and possibility of such knowledge. According to Plotinus, then, any time the individual soul expresses a certain truth in language, this very act is representative of the power of the One. This notion of the simultaneous intimate proximity of the One to the soul, and, paradoxically, its extreme transcendence and ineffability, is possible only within the confines of a purely subjective and introspective philosophy like that of Plotinus; and since such a philosophy, by its very nature, cannot appeal to common, external perceptions, it is destined to remain the sole provenance of the sensitive and enlightened few. Porphyry did not want to admit this, and so he found himself seeking, as St. Augustine tells us, "a universal way (universalem viam) for the liberation of the soul" (City of God 10.32, in Fowden, p. 132), believing, as he did, that no such way had yet been discovered by or within philosophy. This did not imply, for Porphyry, a wholesale rejection of the Plotinian dialectic in favor of a more esoteric process of salvation; but it did lead Porphyry (see above) to look to astrology as a means of orienting the soul toward its place in the cosmos, and thereby allowing it to achieve the desired salvation in the most efficacious manner possible. Iamblichus, on the other hand, rejected even Porphyry's approach, in favor of a path toward the divinity that is more worthy of priests (hieratikoi) than philosophers; for Iamblichus believed that not only the One, but all the gods and demi-gods, exceed and transcend the individual soul, making it necessary for the soul seeking salvation to call upon the superior beings to aid it in its progress. This is accomplished, Iamblichus tells us, by "the perfective operation of unspeakable acts (erga) correctly performed ... acts which are beyond all understanding (huper pasan noêsin)" and which are "intelligible only to the gods" (On the Mysteries II.11.96-7, in Fowden, p. 132). These ritualistic acts, and the 'logic' underlying them, Iamblichus terms "theurgy" (theourgia). These theurgic acts are necessary, for Iamblichus, because he is convinced that philosophy, which is based solely upon thought (ennoia) -- and thought, we must remember, is always an accomplishment of the individual mind, and hence discursive -- is unable to reach that which is beyond thought. The practice of theurgy, then, becomes a way for the soul to experience the presence of the divinity, instead of merely thinking or conceptualizing the godhead. Porphyry took issue with this view, in his Letter to Anebo, which is really a criticism of the ideas of his pupil, Iamblichus, where he stated that, since theurgy is a physical process, it cannot possibly translate into a spiritual effect. Iamblichus' On the Mysteries was written as a reply to Porphyry's criticisms, but the defense of the pupil did not succeed in vanquishing the persistent attacks of the master. While both Porphyry and Iamblichus recognized, to a lesser and greater extent, respectively, the limitations of the Plotinian dialectic, Porphyry held firm to the idea that since the divinity is immaterial it can only be grasped in a noetic fashion -- i.e., discursively (and even astrology, in spite of its mediative capacity, is still an intellectual exercise, open to dialectic and narratization); Iamblichus, adhering roughly to the same view, nevertheless argued that the human soul must not think god on its own terms, but must allow itself to be transformed by the penetrating essence of god, of which the soul partakes through rituals intended to transform the particularized, fragmented soul into a being that is "pure and unchangeable" (cf. On the Mysteries I.12.42; Fowden, p. 133).

i. Theurgy and the Distrust of Dialectic

According to the schema of Plotinian dialectic, the 'stance' of the individual soul is the sole source of truth certainty, being a judging faculty dependent always upon the higher Soul. From the perspective of one who believes that the soul is immersed in Nature, instead of recognizing, as Plotinus did, the soul's status as an intimate governor of Nature (which is the Soul's own act), dialectic may very well appear as a solipsistic (and therefore faulty) attempt on the part of an individual mind to know its reality by imposing conceptual structures and strictures upon the phenomena that constitute this reality. Iamblichus believed that since every individual soul is immersed in the 'bodily element,' no soul is capable of understanding the divine nature through the pure exercise of human reason -- for reason itself, at the level of the human soul-body composite, is tainted by the changeable nature of matter, and therefore incapable of rising to that perfect knowledge that is beyond all change (cp. Plato, Phaedrus 247e). Dialectic, then, as the soul's attempt to know reality, is seen by Iamblichus as an attempt by an already fallen being to lead itself up out of the very locus of its own forgetfulness. Now Iamblichus does not completely reject dialectical reason; he simply requests that it be tempered by an appeal to intermediate divinities, who will aid the fallen soul in its ascent back towards the Supreme Good. The practice of ritualistic theurgy is the medium by which the fallen soul ascends to a point at which it becomes capable of engaging in a meaningful dialectic with the divinity. This dependence upon higher powers nevertheless negates the soul's own innate ability to think itself as god, and so we may say that Iamblichus' ideas represent a decisive break with the philosophy of Plotinus.

4. Proclus and Pseudo-Dionysius

Proclus (410-485 CE) is, next to Plotinus, the most accomplished and rigorous of the Neoplatonists. Born in Constantinople, he studied philosophy in Athens, and through diligent effort rose to the rank of head teacher or 'scholarch' of that great school. In addition to his accomplishments in philosophy, Proclus was also a religious universalist, who had himself initiated into all the mystery religions being practiced during his time. This was doubtless due to the influence of Iamblichus, whom Proclus held in high esteem (cf. Proclus, Theology of Plato III; in Hegel, p. 432). The philosophical expression of Proclus is more precise and logically ordered than that of Plotinus. Indeed, Proclus posits the Intellect (nous) as the culmination of the productive act (paragein) of the One; this is in opposition to Plotinus, who described the Intellect as proceeding directly from the One, thereby placing Mind before Thought, and so making thought the process by which the Intellect becomes alienated from itself, thus requiring the salvific act in order to attain the fulfillment of Being, which is, for Plotinus, the return of Intellect to itself. Proclus understands the movement of existence as a tripartite progression beginning with an abstract unity, passing into a multiplicity that is identified with Life, and returning again to a unity that is no longer merely abstract, but now actualized as an eternal manifestation of the godhead. What constituted, for Plotinus, the salvific drama of human existence is, for Proclus, simply the logical, natural order of things. However, by thus removing the yearning for salvation from human existence, as something to be accomplished, positively, Proclus is ignoring or overly intellectualizing, if you will, an existential aspect of human existence that is as real as it is powerful. Plotinus recognized the importance of the salvific drive for the realization of true philosophy, making philosophy a means to an end; Proclus utilizes philosophy, rather, more in the manner of a useful, descriptive language by which a thinker may describe the essential realities of a merely contingent existence. In this sense, Proclus is more faithful to the 'letter' of Plato's Dialogues; but for this same reason he fails to rise to the 'spirit' of the Platonic philosophy. Proclus' major works include commentaries on Plato's Timaeus, Republic, Parmenides, Alcibiades I, and the Cratylus. He also wrote treatises on the Theology of Plato, On Providence, and On the Subsistence of Evil. His most important work is undoubtedly the Elements of Theology, which contains the clearest exposition of his ideas.

a. Being -- Becoming -- Being

We found, in Plotinus, an explanation and expression of a cosmos that involved a gradual development from all but static unity toward eventual alienation -- a moment at which the active soul must make the profound decision to renounce autonomous existence and re-merge with the source of all Being, or else remain forever in the darkness of forgetfulness and error. Salvation, for Plotinus, was relatively easy to accomplish, but never guaranteed. For Proclus, on the other hand, the arkhê or 'ruling beginning' of all Life is the 'One-in-itself' (to auto hen), or that which is responsible for the ordering of all existents, insofar as existence is, in the last analysis, the sovereign act or expression of this primordial unity or monad. The expression of this One is perfectly balanced, being a trinity containing, as distinct expressions, each moment of self-realization of this One; and each of these moments, according to Proclus, have the structure of yet another trinity. The first trinity corresponds to the limit, which is the guide and reference-point of all further manifestations; the second to the unlimited, which is also Life or the productive power (dunamis); and the third, finally, to the 'mixture' (mikton, diakosmos), which is the self-reflective moment of return during which the soul realizes itself as a thinking -- i.e., living -- entity. Thought is, therefore, the culmination of Life and the fulfillment of Being. Thought is also the reason (logos) that binds these triadic unities together in a grand harmonious plêrôma, if you will. Being, for Proclus, is that divine self-presence, "shut up without development and maintained in strict isolation" (Hegel, p. 446) which is the object of Life's thinking; this 'object' gives rise to that thinking which leads, eventually, to understanding (nous), which is the thought of being, and appears (ekphanôs), always, as 'being's begetter'. When the circle is completed, and reflected upon, logically, we are met with the following onto-cosmological schema: thought (noêtos, also known as 'Being') giving rise to its "negative" which is thinking (Hegel, p. 393) and the thought 'it is' (noêtos kai noêros), produces its own precise reflection -- 'pure thinking' -- and this reflection is the very manifestation (phanerôsis) of the deity within the fluctuating arena of individual souls. Being is eternal and static precisely because it always returns to itself as Being; and 'Becoming'is the conceptual term for this process, which involves the cyclical play between that which is and is not, at any given time. "[T]he thought of every man is identical with the existence of every man, and each is both the thought and the existence" (Proclus, Platonic Theology III., in Hegel, p. 449). The autonomous drive toward dissolution, which is so germane to the soul as such, is wiped away by Proclus, for his dialectic is impeccably clean. However, he does not account for the yearning for the infinite (as does Plotinus) and the consequent existential desire for productive power falls on its face before the supreme god of autonomous creation -- which draws all existents into its primeval web of dissolution.

b. The God Beyond Being

Very little is known about the life of the so-called Pseudo-Dionysius. For many centuries, the writings of this mystical philosopher were believed to have been from the pen of none other Dionysius, the disciple of St. Paul. Later scholarship has shed considerable doubt on this claim, and most modern scholars believe this author to have been active during the late fifth century CE. Indeed, the earliest reference to the Dionysian Corpus that we possess is from 533 CE. There is no mention of this author's work before this date. Careful study of the Pseudo-Dionysian writings has uncovered many parallels between the theurgical doctrines of Iamblichus, and the triadic metaphysical schema of Proclus. Yet what we witness in these writings is the attempt by a thinker who is at once religiously sensitive and philosophically engaged to bring the highly developed Platonism of his time into line with a Christian theological tradition that was apparently persisting on the fringes of orthodoxy. To this extent, we may refer to the Pseudo-Dionysius as a 'decadent,' for he (or she?) was writing at a time when the heyday of Platonism had attained the status of a palaios logos ('ancient teaching') to be, not merely commented upon, but savored as an aesthetic monument to an era already long past. It is important to note, in this regard, that the writings of Pseudo-Dionysius do not contain any theoretical arguments or dialectical moments, but simply many subtle variations on the apophatic/kataphatic theology for which our writer is renowned. Indeed, he writes as if his readers already know, and are merely in need of clarification. His message is quite simple, and is manifestly distilled from the often cumbersome doctrines of earlier thinkers (especially Iamblichus and Proclus). Pseudo-Dionysius professes a God who is beyond all distinctions, and who even transcends the means utilized by human beings to reach Him. For Pseudo-Dionysius, the Holy Trinity (which is probably analogous to Proclus' highest trinity, see above) serves as a "guide" to the human being who seeks not only to know but to unite with "him who is beyond all being and knowledge" (Pseudo-Dionysius, The Mystical Theology 997A-1000A, tr. C. Luibheid 1987). In the expression of the Pseudo-Dionysius the yearning for the infinite reaches a poetical form that at once fulfills and exceeds philosophy.

5. Appendix:`The Renaissance Platonists

After the closing of the Neoplatonic Academy in Athens by the Emperor Justinian in 529 CE, Platonism ceased to be a living philosophy. Due to the efforts of the Christian philosopher Boethius (480-525 CE), who translated Porphyry's Isagoge, and composed numerous original works as well, the Middle Ages received a faint glimmer of the ancient glories of the Platonic philosophy. St. Augustine, also, was responsible for imparting a sense of Neoplatonic doctrine to the Latin West, but this was by way of commentary and critique, and not in any way a systematic exposition of the philosophy. Generally speaking, it is safe to say that the European Middle Ages remained in the grip of Aristotelianism until the early Renaissance, when certain brilliant Italian thinkers began to rediscover, translate, and expound upon the original texts of Platonism. Chief among these thinkers were Marsilio Ficino (1433-1492) and Pico della Mirandola (1463-1494). Ficino produced fine Latin translations of Plato's Dialogues, the Enneads of Plotinus, and numerous works by Porphyry, Iamblichus, Proclus, Pseudo-Dionysius, and many others. In addition to his scholarly ability, Ficino was also a fine commentator and philosopher in his own right. His brilliant essay on Five Questions Concerning The Mind is a concise summary of general Neoplatonic doctrine, based upon Ficino's own view that the lot of the human soul is to inquire into its own nature, and that since this inquiry causes the human soul to experience misery, the soul must do everything it can to transcend the physical body and live a life worthy of the blessed angels (cf. Cassirer, et. al. (ed) 1948, p. 211-212). Giovanni Pico, the Count of Mirandola, was a colorful figure who lived a short life, fraught with strife. He roused the ire of the papacy by composing a voluminous work defending nine-hundred theses drawn from his vast reading of the Ancients; thirteen of these theses were deemed heretical by the papacy, and yet Pico refused to change or withdraw a single one. Like his friend Ficino, Pico was a devotee of ancient wisdom, drawing not only upon the Platonic canon, but also upon the Pre-Socratic literature and the Hermetic Corpus, especially the Poimandres. Pico's most famous work is the Oration on the Dignity of Man, in which he eloquently states his learned view that humankind was created by God "as a creature of indeterminate nature," possessed of the unique ability to ascend or descend on the scale of Being through the autonomous exercise of free will (Oration 3, in Cassirer, et. al. (ed) 1948, p. 224). Pico's view of free will was quite different from that expressed by Plotinus, and indeed most other Neoplatonists, and it came as no surprise when Pico composed a treatise On Being and the One which ended on Aristotelian terms, declaring the One to be coincident with or persisting amidst Being -- a wholly un-Platonic doctrine. With Ficino, then, we may say that Platonism achieved a brief moment of archaic glory, while with Pico, it was plunged once again into the quagmire of self-referential empiricism.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Cassirer, Ernst; Kristeller, Paul Oskar; Randall, John Herman Jr. (editors) The Renaissance Philosophy of Man (University of Chicago Press 1948).
  • Cooper, John M. (ed.), Plato: Complete Works (Hackett Publishing 1997).
  • Copleston S.J., Frederick, A History of Philosophy (vol. I, part II): Greece and Rome (Image Books 1962).
  • Dillon, John (1977), The Middle Platonists (Cornell University Press).
  • Eusebius (tr. G.A. Williamson 1965), The History of the Church (Penguin Books).
  • Fowden, Garth, The Egyptian Hermes: A Historical Approach To The Late Pagan Mind (Cambridge University Press 1986).
  • Hadot, Pierre (tr. M. Chase), Plotinus, or The Simplicity of Vision (University of Chicago Press 1993).
  • Hegel, Georg Wilhelm Friedrich (tr. E.S. Haldane and Frances H. Simson), Lectures on the History of Philosophy (vol. II): Plato And The Platonists (Bison Books 1995).
  • Jaeger, Werner, Early Christianity and Greek Paideia (Harvard University Press 1961).
  • Layton, Bentley (1987), The Gnostic Scriptures (Doubleday: The Anchor Bible Reference Library).
  • O'Brien S.J., Elmer (1964), The Essential Plotinus: Representative Treatises From The Enneads (Hackett Publishing).
  • Origen of Alexandria, Commentary on John, tr. in The Ante-Nicene Fathers, vol. X. (Eerdmans 1979, reprint).
  • Origen of Alexandria, On First Principles [De Principiis], tr. in The Ante-Nicene Fathers, vol. IV. (Eerdmans 1979, reprint).
  • Philo of Alexandria (tr. F.H. Colson and G.H. Whitaker), On the Creation of the World [De Opificio Mundi], in vol. 1 of The Loeb Classical Library edition of Philo (Harvard University Press 1929).
  • Plotinus (tr. A.H. Armstrong), The Enneads, in seven volumes (Loeb Classical Library: Harvard University Press 1966).
  • Porphyry (tr. K. Guthrie), Launching-Points to the Realm of Mind [Pros ta noeta aphorismoi] (Phanes Press 1988).
  • Porphyry (tr. A. Zimmern), Porphyry's Letter to His Wife Marcella Concerning the Life of Philosophy and the Ascent to the Gods (Phanes Press 1986).
  • Porphyry (tr. A.H. Armstrong), Life of Plotinus [Vita Plotini], in volume one of the Loeb Classical Library edition of Plotinus (Harvard University Press 1966).
  • Proclus (tr. T. Taylor), Lost Fragments of Proclus (Wizards Bookshelf 1988).
  • Proclus (tr. T. Taylor), Ten Doubts Concerning Providence, and On the Subsistence of Evil (Ares Publishers 1980).
  • Pseudo-Dionysius (tr. C. Luibheid 1987), Pseudo-Dionysius: The Complete Works (Paulist Press).

Author Information

Edward Moore
St. Elias School of Orthodox Theology
U. S. A.

Origen of Alexandria (185—254 C.E.)

OrigenOrigen of Alexandria, one of the greatest Christian theologians,  is famous for composing the seminal work of Christian Neoplatonism, his treatise On First Principles. Origen lived through a turbulent period of the Christian Church, when persecution was wide-spread and little or no doctrinal consensus existed among the various regional churches. In this environment, Gnosticism flourished, and Origen was the first truly philosophical thinker to turn his hand not only to a refutation of Gnosticism, but to offer an alternative Christian system that was more rigorous and philosophically respectable than the mythological speculations of the various Gnostic sects. Origen was also an astute critic of the pagan philosophy of his era, yet he also learned much from it, and adapted its most useful and edifying teachings to a grand elucidation of the Christian faith. Porphyry (the illustrious student of Plotinus), though a tenacious adversary of Christianity, nevertheless grudgingly admitted Origen's mastery of the Greek philosophical tradition. Although Origen did go on to compose numerous biblical commentaries and sermons, his importance for the history of philosophy rests mainly on two works, the systematic treatise On First Principles, and his response to the pagan philosopher Celsus' attack on Christianity, the treatise Against Celsus. Since the purpose of this article is to introduce students and interested laypersons to the philosophy of Origen, it will be necessary to focus mainly on the treatise On First Principles, which is the most systematic and philosophical of Origen's numerous writings. In this work Origen establishes his main doctrines, including that of the Holy Trinity (based upon standard Middle Platonic triadic emanation schemas); the pre-existence and fall of souls; multiple ages and transmigration of souls; and the eventual restoration of all souls to a state of dynamic perfection in proximity to the godhead. He is unique among Platonists of his era for introducing history into his cosmological and metaphysical speculations, and his insistence on the absolute freedom of each and every soul, thereby denying the fatalism that so often found its way into the more esoteric teachings of the various philosophical and mystery schools of his day.

Table of Contents

  1. Origen's Life and Times
  2. His Intellectual Heritage: Pagan, Jewish and Christian
  3. The Philosophical System of Origen
    1. The Trinity
    2. Souls and their Fall
    3. Multiple Ages, Metempsychosis, and the Restoration of All
  4. Important Themes in Origen's Philosophy
    1. Free Will
    2. Education and History
    3. Eternal Motion of Souls
  5. Origen's Importance in the History of Philosophy
    1. Hellenistic Philosophy
    2. Christianity
  6. Concluding Summary
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Origen's Life and Times

Origen was, according to Eusebius, "not quite seventeen" when Septimius Severus' persecution of the Christians began "in the tenth year of [his] reign," (Ecclesiastical History; tr. Williamson, p. 179) which gives the approximate date of Origen's birth as 185/6 C.E. He died around the reign of Gallus, which places his death in 254/5 C.E. Origen lived during a turbulent period of the Roman Empire, when the barbarian invasions were sweeping across Europe, threatening the stability of the Roman Empire. His was also a time of periodic persecution against Christians, notably during the reigns of the Emperors Severus, Maximin, and Decius, so that Origen's life began and ended with persecution.

His family was devoutly Christian, and likely highly educated; for his father, who died a martyr, made sure that Origen was schooled not only in biblical studies, but in Hellenistic education as well. Eusebius (Ecclesiastical History, tr. Williamson, p. 182) tells us that Origen was only seventeen when he took over as Headmaster (didaskalos) of the Christian Catechetical School at Alexandria. He became interested in Greek philosophy quite early in his life, studying for a while under Ammonius Saccas (the teacher of Plotinus) and amassing a large collection of philosophical texts. It is probably around this time that he began composing On First Principles. However, as he became ever more devoted to the Christian faith, he sold his library, abandoning, for a time, any contact with pagan Greek wisdom, though he would eventually return to secular studies (Greek philosophy), from which he derived no small measure of inspiration, as Porphyry (recorded in Eusebius) makes quite clear, as he continued with his ever more sophisticated elucidation of biblical texts.

2. His Intellectual Heritage: Pagan, Jewish and Christian

Origen's debt to Holy Scripture is obvious; he quotes the bible at great length, often drawing together seemingly disparate passages to make a profound theological point. Yet his thought is all the while informed by his Greek philosophical education, specifically that of the Middle Platonic tradition, notably the works of the Jewish Platonist Philo of Alexandria and the Neopythagorean philosopher Numenius of Apamea (fl. 150-176 C.E.). Origen shares with Philo an insistence on the free will of the person, a freedom that is direct evidence of humanity's likeness to God - for, like God's Being, human existence is free from all necessity. From Numenius, Origen likely adopted the conception of a "second god" proceeding from a first, ineffable being called the One, "First God," or Father. Numenius referred to this "second god" as Demiurge or craftsman, and taught that he created the cosmos by imitating the intellectual content of the "First God." Origen applied this basic notion to his doctrine of Christ, whom he also called Demiurge (Commentary on John 1.22), and went on to describe Christ as a reflection of the Truth of the Father, stating that compared to human beings Christ is Truth, but compared to the Father He is falsehood (Jerome, Epistle 92, quoting Origen; see also On First Principles 1.2.6).

Another extremely important part of Origen's intellectual heritage is the concept of apokatastasis or "restoration of all things." This term first appears, as a philosophical concept, in the writings of the Stoics, whose materialistic pantheism led them to identify Zeus with the pure, "craftsmanly" fire pervading and constituting the cosmos. According to the Stoics, this fire expands and contracts according to a fixed cycle. They called the contraction a "conflagration" (ekpurôsis), destroying the cosmos, yet only temporarily. This contraction was described as Zeus returning to his own thoughts, to contemplate the eternal perfection of his mind/cosmos (the material cosmos being the expression of his mind, or Logos). The expansion would occur when Zeus once again expressed his mind in the creation of the material cosmos; this re-creation or reconstitution of the cosmos is what the Stoics called apokatastasis. Some Stoics argued that since Zeus is perfect mind, then every reconstitution of the cosmos will resemble identically the one that preceded it. This Stoic doctrine was to have an immense influence on the development of the so-called esoteric traditions in the Hellenistic era, notably the Hermetic school, Gnosticism, and astrology, with all of which Origen was, in varying degrees, familiar.

In Origen's time, Christianity as a religion had not yet developed a system of theology as a basis of orthodoxy; therefore, in addition to a wide variety of opinions regarding the faith, there were also various sects, each claiming to possess the truth of the Christian faith. Foremost among these sects was the group of schools loosely labelled 'gnostic.' The Valentinian school (founded by Valentinus, an outstanding teacher and philosopher who was at one point a candidate for bishop of Rome) was the most philosophically accomplished of the Christian Gnostic sects. In his Commentary on John, Origen refutes the doctrines of a Valentinian Gnostic named Heracleon, who had earlier written a commentary on the same Gospel. While Origen's opposition to Gnosticism precluded any doctrinal influence, he saw in Gnosticism the value of a system, for it was precisely by virtue of their elaborate and self-consistent systems that the Gnostics were successful in gaining adherents. Since there were no non-Gnostic Christian theological systems in his day, it was up to Origen to formulate one. This was the program of his treatise On First Principles.

3. The Philosophical System of Origen

Origen was the first systematic theologian and philosopher of the Christian Church. Earlier Christian intellectuals had confined themselves to apologetic and moralizing works; notable among such writers is Clement of Alexandria (d. 215 C.E.), who, like Origen, found much of value in Hellenic philosophy. Before proceeding with an examination of Origen's system, it must be noted that scholars are divided over the question of whether or not his On First Principles contains a system. Henri Crouzel (1989), for example, has argued that the presence of contradictory statements in certain portions of the treatise, as well as in other texts, is proof against the claim that Origen was presenting a system. Hans Jonas (1974), on the other hand, recognized a clear system in On First Principles and gave a convincing elucidation of such. The reason for this scholarly divide is mostly due to the lack of a precise definition of 'system' and 'systematic'. If one approaches Origen's text expecting a carefully worked-out system of philosophy in the manner of a Kant or a Hegel, one will be disappointed. However, if one reads the text with an eye for prominent themes and inner consistency of such themes with one another, a system does emerge. As John Dillon has pointed out, Origen succeeded in luring away several students of the renowned Platonic teacher Ammonius Saccas to study with him, and, Dillon convincingly observes, this would not have been possible if Origen did not have some system to offer (Dillon, in Kannengiesser, Petersen, ed. 1988, p. 216, and footnote). It must also be pointed out that the text of On First Principles that we possess is not complete. Origen's original Greek is preserved only in fragments, the remainder of the text is extant only in a Latin translation by Rufinus, who was a defender of Origen against posthumous charges of heresy. While Rufinus' translation is, as far as we can tell, faithful in most respects, there is ample evidence that he softened certain potentially troublesome passages in an ill-guided attempt to redeem his beloved teacher. When reading Origen's treatise, then, one would do well to keep this in mind should one stumble across seemingly contradictory passages, for one has no way of knowing what the original Greek might have said.

a. The Trinity

Origen begins his treatise On First Principles by establishing, in typical Platonic fashion, a divine hierarchical triad; but instead of calling these principles by typical Platonic terms like monad, dyad, and world-soul, he calls them "Father," "Christ," and "Holy Spirit," though he does describe these principles using Platonic language. The first of these principles, the Father, is a perfect unity, complete unto Himself, and without body - a purely spiritual mind. Since God the Father is, for Origen, "personal and active," it follows that there existed with Him, always, an entity upon which to exercise His intellectual activity. This entity is Christ the Son, the Logos, or Wisdom (Sophia), of God, the first emanation of the Father, corresponding to Numenius' "second god," as we have seen above (section 2). The third and last principle of the divine triad is the Holy Spirit, who "proceeds from the Son and is related to Him as the Son is related to the Father" (A. Tripolitis 1978, p. 94). Here is Origen explaining the status of the Holy Spirit, in a passage preserved in the original Greek:

The God and Father, who holds the universe together, is superior to every being that exists, for he imparts to each one from his own existence that which each one is; the Son, being less than the Father, is superior to rational creatures alone (for he is second to the Father); the Holy Spirit is still less, and dwells within the saints alone. So that in this way the power of the Father is greater than that of the Son and of the Holy Spirit, and that of the Son is more than that of the Holy Spirit, and in turn the power of the Holy Spirit exceeds that of every other holy being (Fragment 9 [Koetschau] tr. Butterworth 1966, pp. 33-34, and footnote).

This graded hierarchy reveals an allotment of power to the second and third members of the Trinity: the Father's power is universal, but the Son's corresponds only to rational creatures, while the Spirit's power corresponds strictly to the "saints" or those who have achieved salvation. Such a structure of divine influence on the created realm is found much later in the system of the Neoplatonic philosopher Proclus (see J. Dillon, in G. Vesey, ed. 1989).

b. Souls and their Fall

According to Origen, God's first creation was a collectivity of rational beings which he calls logika. "Although Origen speaks of the logika as being created, they were not created in time. Creation with respect to them means that they had a beginning, but not a temporal one" (Tripolitis 1978, p. 94). Further, Origen explains that the number of these rational beings is necessarily limited, since an infinite creation would be incomprehensible, and unworthy of God. These souls were originally created in close proximity to God, with the intention that they should explore the divine mysteries in a state of endless contemplation. They grew weary of this intense contemplation, however, and lapsed, falling away from God and into an existence on their own terms, apart from the divine presence and the wisdom to be found there. This fall was not, it must be understood, the result of any inherent imperfection in the creatures of God, rather, it was the result of a misuse of the greatest gift of God to His creation: freedom. The only rational creature who escaped the fall and remained with God is the "soul of Christ" (Origen, On First Principles 2.6.5; Tripolitis 1978, p. 96). This individual soul is indicative of the intended function of all souls, i.e., to reveal the divine mystery in unique ways, insofar as the meaning of this mystery is deposited within them, as theandric (God-human) potentiality, to be drawn out and revealed through co-operation with God (On First Principles 2.9.2-8). As Origen explains, the soul of Christ was no different from that of any of the souls that fell away from God, for Christ's soul possessed the same potential for communion with God as that of all other souls. What distinguished the soul of Christ from all others - and what preserved Him from falling away - was His supreme act of free choice, to remain immersed in the divinity.

What are now souls (psukhê) began as minds, and through boredom or distraction grew "cold" (psukhesthai) as they moved away from the "divine warmth" (On First Principles 2.8.3). Thus departing from God, they came to be clothed in bodies, at first of "a fine ethereal and invisible nature," but later, as souls fell further away from God, their bodies changed "from a fine, ethereal and invisible body to a body of a coarser and more solid state. The purity and subtleness of the body with which a soul is enveloped depends upon the moral development and perfection of the soul to which it is joined. Origen states that there are varying degrees of subtleness even among the celestial and spiritual bodies" (Tripolitis 1978, p. 106). When a soul achieves salvation, according to Origen, it ceases being a soul, and returns to a state of pure "mind" or understanding. However, due to the fall, now "no rational spirit can ever exist without a body" (Tripolitis 1978, p. 114), but the bodies of redeemed souls are "spiritual bodies," made of the purest fire (see A. Scott 1991, Chapter 9).

c. Multiple Ages, Metempsychosis, and the Restoration of All

Origen did not believe in the eternal suffering of sinners in hell. For him, all souls, including the devil himself, will eventually achieve salvation, even if it takes innumerable ages to do so; for Origen believed that God's love is so powerful as to soften even the hardest heart, and that the human intellect - being the image of God - will never freely choose oblivion over proximity to God, the font of Wisdom Himself. Certain critics of Origen have claimed that this teaching undermines his otherwise firm insistence on free will, for, these critics argue, the souls must maintin the freedom to ultimately reject or accept God, or else free will becomes a mere illusion. What escapes these critics is the fact that Origen's conception of free will is not our own; he considered freedom in the Platonic sense of the ability to choose the good. Since evil is not the polar opposite of good, but rather simply the absence of good - and thus having no real existence - then to 'choose' evil is not to make a conscious decision, but to act in ignorance of the measure of all rational decision, i.e., the good. Origen was unable to conceive of a God who would create souls that were capable of dissolving into the oblivion of evil (non-being) for all eternity. Therefore, he reasoned that a single lifetime is not enough for a soul to achieve salvation, for certain souls require more education or 'healing' than others. So he developed his doctrine of multiple ages, in which souls would be re-born, to experience the educative powers of God once again, with a view to ultimate salvation. This doctrine, of course, implies some form of transmigration of souls or metempsychosis. Yet Origen's version of metempsychosis was not the same as that of the Pythagoreans, for example, who taught that the basest of souls will eventually become incarnated as animals. For Origen, some sort of continuity between the present body, and the body in the age to come, was maintained (Jerome, Epistle to Avitus 7, quoting Origen; see also Commentary on Matthew 11.17). Origen did not, like many of his contemporaries, degrade the body to the status of an unwanted encrustation imprisoning the soul; for him, the body is a necessary principle of limitation, providing each soul with a unique identity. This is an important point for an understanding of Origen's epistemology, which is based upon the idea that God educates each soul according to its inherent abilities, and that the abilities of each soul will determine the manner of its knowledge. We may say, then, that the uniqueness of the soul's body is an image of its uniqueness of mind. This is the first inkling of the development of the concept of the person and personality in the history of Western thought.

The restoration of all beings (apokatastasis) is the most important concept in Origen's philosophy, and the touchstone by which he judges all other theories. His concept of universal restoration is based on equally strong Scriptural and Hellenistic philosophical grounds and is not original, as it can be traced back to Heraclitus, who stated that "the beginning and end are common" (Fragment B 103, tr. J. Barnes 1987, p. 115). Considering that Origen's later opponents based their charges of heresy largely on this aspect of his teaching, it is surprising to see how well-grounded in scripture this doctrine really is. Origen's main biblical proof-text is 1 Corinthians 15:25-28, especially verse 28, which speaks of the time "when all things shall be subdued unto him [Christ], then shall the Son also himself be subject unto him that put all things under him, that God may be all in all" (KJV, my emphasis). This scriptural notion of God being "all in all" (panta en pasin) is a strong theological support for his theory of apokatastasis. There are, of course, numerous other passages in scripture that contradict this notion, but we must remember that Origen's strength resided in his philosophical ability to use reason and dialectic in support of humane doctrines, not in the ability to use scripture in support of dogmatical and anti-humanistic arguments. Origen imagined salvation not in terms of the saved rejoicing in heaven and the damned suffering in hell, but as a reunion of all souls with God.

4. Important Themes in Origen's Philosophy

While Origen's lengthy treatise On First Principles contains numerous discussions of a wide variety of issues relevant to the Christianity of his day, as well as to broader philosophical concerns, certain key themes do emerge that are of universal and timeless value for philosophy. These themes are: free will; the educational value of history; and the infinity and eternal motion (becoming) of human beings.

a. Free Will

Origen's conception of freedom, as discussed above, was not the same as modern conceptions. This is not to say that his conception was wrong, of course. For Origen recognized freedom only in reason, in rationality, which is precisely the ability to recognize and embrace the good, which is for him God. Irrationality is ignorance, the absence of a conception of the good. The ignorant person cannot be held responsible for his ignorance, except to the extent that he has been lazy, not applying himself to the cultivation of reason. The moral dimension of this conception of freedom is that ignorance is not to be punished, but remedied through education. Punishment, understood in the punative sense, is of no avail and will even lead to deeper ignorance and sin, as the punished soul grows resentful, not understanding why he is being punished. Origen firmly believed that the knowledge of the good (God) is itself enough to remove all taint of sin and ignorance from souls. A 'freedom' to embrace evil (the absence of good) would have made no sense to Origen who, as a Platonist, identified evil with enslavement and goodness with freedom. The soul who has seen the good, he argued, will not fall into ignorance again, for the good is inspiring and worthy of eternal contemplation (see Commentary on Romans 5.10.15).

b. Education and History

Origen may rightfully be called the first philosopher of history, for, like Hegel, he understood history as a process involving the participation of persons in grand events leading to an eventual culmination or 'end of history'. Unlike mainstream Christian eschatology, Origen did not understand the end of history as the final stage of a grand revelation of God, but rather as the culmination of a human-divine (co-operative) process, in which the image and likeness of God (humanity) is re-united with its source and model, God Himself (see Against Celsus 4.7; On First Principles 2.11.5, 2.11.7; Tripolitis 1978, p. 111). This is accomplished through education of souls who, having fallen away from God, are now sundered from the divine presence and require a gradual re-initiation into the mysteries of God. Such a reunion must not be accomplished by force, for God will never, Origen insists, undermine the free will of His creatures; rather, God will, over the course of numerous ages if need be, educate souls little by little, leading them eventually, by virtue of their own growing responsiveness, back to Himself, where they will glory in the uncovering of the infinite mysteries of the eternal godhead (On First Principles 2.11.6-7).

c. Eternal Motion of Souls

A common motif in Platonism during, before, and after Origen's time is salvific stasis, or the idea that the soul will achieve complete rest and staticity when it finally ascends to a contemplation of the good. We notice this idea early on in Plato, who speaks in the Republic (517c-d, 519c-e) of a state of pure contemplation from which the philosopher is only wrenched by force or persuasion. In Origen's own time, Plotinus developed his notion of an 'about-face' (epistrophê) of the soul resulting in an instant union of the soul with its divine principle, understood as an idealized, changeless form of contemplation, allowing for no dynamism or personal development (see Enneads 4.3.32, 4.8.4, for example). Influenced indirectly by Plotinus, and more directly by later Neoplatonists (both Christian and pagan), the Christian theologian St. Maximus the Confessor elaborated a systematic philosophical theology culminating in an eschatology in which the unique human person was replaced by the overwhelming, transcendent presence of God (see Chapters on Knowledge 2.88). Origen managed to maintain the transcendentality of God on the one hand, and the dynamic persistence of souls in being on the other. He did this by defining souls not by virtue of their intellectual content (or, in the Plotinian sense, for example, by virtue of their 'prior' or higher, constitutive principle) but rather by their ability to engage in a finite manner with the infinite God. This engagement is constitutive of the soul's existence, and guarantees its uniqueness. Each soul engages uniquely with God in contemplating divine mysteries according to its innate ability, and this engagement persists for all eternity, for the mysteries of the godhead are inexhaustible, as is the enthusiastic application of the souls' intellectual ability.

5. Origen's Importance in the History of Philosophy

Throughout this article, Origen's importance has largely been linked to his melding of philosophical insights with elucidations of various aspects of the Christian fatih. Yet his importance for Hellenistic philosophy is marked, and though not quite as pervasive as his influence on Christian thought, is nevertheless worth a few brief remarks. His role in the formation of Christian doctrine is more prominent, yet, because of its problematical nature, will be treated of only briefly.

a. Hellenistic Philosophy

Origen's debt to Hellenistic (Greek) philosophy is quite obvious; his influence on the development of later pagan philosophy is - at least from the perspective of most contemporary scholarship - rather less obvious, but it is there. His trinitarian doctrine, for example, consisted of a gradation of influence beginning with the Father, whose influence was of the most general, universal kind, binding together all things; the influence of the Son extended strictly to sentient beings; the Holy Spirit's influence extended only to the 'elect' or saints who had already achieved salvation (Dillon, in D.J. O'Meara, ed., 1982, p. 20; see also On First Principles 1.3.5). This conception found later expression in Proclus' Elements of Theology (Proposition 57), where he elucidates this formulation: "Every cause both operates prior to its consequent and gives rise to a greater number of posterior terms" (tr. Dodds). For Origen, the pre-existent souls, through their fall, gave rise to a history over which both the Father and the Son came to preside, while the Holy Spirit only enters into human reality to effect a salvific re-orientation toward God that is already the result of an achieved history. The Holy Spirit, then, may be understood as the final cause, the preparatory causes of which are the Father and Son, the mutual begetters of history. A bit later, the pagan philosopher Iamblichus reversed this Origenian notion, claiming that the influence of the divine became stronger and more concentrated the further it penetrated into created reality, extending in its pure power even to stones and plants. In this sense, the Holy Spirit, limited as it is (according to Origen) to interaction with the saints alone, gives way to the universal power of the Father, which extends to the furthest reaches of reality. Iamblichus saw no reason to divide the divinity into persons or emanative effects; rather, he saw the divinity as operative, in varying degrees, at every level of reality. At the lowest level, however, this power is most effective, imparting power to plants and stones, and providing support for the theurgical practice advocated by Iamblichus (Olympiodorus, Commentary on Alcibiades I, 115A; Psellus, Chaldaean Expositions 1153a10-11; Dillon, ed. O'Meara 1982, p. 23).

b. Christianity

Origen's ideas, most notably those in the treatise On First Principles, gave rise to a movement in the Christian Church known as Origenism. From the third through the sixth centuries this movement was quite influential, especially among the monastics, and was given articulate - if excessively codified form - by the theologian Evagrius Ponticus (c. 345-400 C.E.). It is to be noted that the spirit of philosophical inquiry exemplified by Origen was largely absent from the movement bearing his name. A far more creative use of Origen's concepts and themes was made by Gregory of Nyssa (d. ca. 386 C.E.), who adopted Origen's doctrine of apokatastasis or "restoration of all things." Gregory was also responsible for articulating more clearly than did Origen the notion that redeemed souls will remain in a state of dynamic intellectual activity (see Gregory of Nyssa, Catechetical Oration, esp. Chapters 26 and 35). After the posthumous condemnation of Origen (and Origenism) in the fifth century, it became increasingly difficult for mainstream theologians to make use of his work. Pseudo-Dionysius the Areopagite (5th or 6th Century C.E.) drew upon Neoplatonic philosophy, especially Proclus (411-485 C.E.) and Iamblichus (ca. 240-325 C.E.), and though he followed in Origen's footsteps in this use of pagan wisdom, he never mentioned his predecessor by name. In the seventh century, Maximus the Confessor (ca. 580-662), who may be called the last great Christian Neoplatonist, set about revising Origen's doctrines in a manner more acceptable to the theological climate of the early Byzantine Church. Maximus changed the historicism of Origen into a more introspective, personal struggle to attain the divine vision through asceticism and prayer, the result being a total subsumption of the person by the godhead. This was Maximus' vision of salvation: the replacement of the ego by the divine presence (see L. Thunberg 1985, p. 89; also Maximus, Chapters on Knowledge 2.88). While there is much that may be called brilliant and even inspiring in Maximus' philosophical theology, this loss of the centrality of the person - as unique, unrepeatable entity - in the cosmic process of salvation led to the loss of a sense of co-operation of humanity and God, and sapped Christianity of the intellectual vigor that it displayed in the period leading up to the establishment of a theocratical Byzantine state.

Thankfully, Origen's legacy was not lost. He was an inspiration to the Renaissance Humanists and, more recently, to certain Existentialist Christian theologians, notably Nicolas Berdyaev (1874-1948) whose insistence on the absolute autonomy and nobility of the person in the face of all objectifying reality is an echo across the ages of the humanism of Origen. Berdyaev himself admits Origen's influence on his thought (as well as that of Gregory of Nyssa) and insists that the doctrine of hell and the eternal suffering of sinners is not compatible with authentic Christianity. He also places a great importance on history, and even broaches a modern, de-mythologized conception of metempsychosis in terms of a universal, shared history of which all persons are a part, regardless of their temporal specificity. History, according to Berdyaev (and in this he follows Origen) binds all of humanity together. No soul will be saved in isolation; all must be saved together, or not be saved at all. Berdyaev wrote numerous works, a few of the most important are Slavery and Freedom (Eng. tr. 1944), The Beginning and the End(Eng. tr.1952), and Truth and Revelation (Eng. tr. 1962).

6. Concluding Summary

Origen was an innovator in an era when innovation, for Christians, was a luxury ill-afforded. He drew upon pagan philosophy in an effort to elucidate the Christian faith in a manner acceptable to intellectuals, and he succeeded in converting many gifted pagan students of philosophy to his faith. He was also a great humanist, who believed that all creatures will eventually achieve salvation, including the devil himself. Origen did not embrace the dualism of Gnosticism, nor that of the more primitive expressions of the Christian faith still extant in his day. Rather, he took Christianity to a higher level, finding in it a key to the perfection of the intellect or mind, which is what all souls are in their pure form. The restoration of all souls to a purely intellectual existence was Origen's faith, and his philosophy was based upon such a faith. In this, he is an heir to Socrates and Plato, but he also brought a new conception into philosophy - that of the creative aspect of the soul, as realized in history, the culmination of which is salvation, after which follows an eternal delving into the deep mysteries of God.

7. References and Further Reading


Selected Works by Origen in English Translation

  • Origen, Against Celsus, tr. F. Crombie (The Ante-Nicene Fathers 4; Michigan: Eerdmans 1979, reprint).
  • Origen, On First Principles, tr. G.W. Butterworth (New York: Harper and Row 1966).
  • Origen, Commentary on John, tr. A. Menzies (The Ante-Nicene Fathers 10; Michigan: Eerdmans 1978, reprint).
  • Origen, Commentary on Matthew, tr. J. Patrick (The Ante-Nicene Fathers 10; Michigan: Eerdmans 1978, reprint).
  • Origen, Commentary on the Epistle to the Romans (Books 1-5), tr. T.P. Scheck (Washington, D.C.: The Catholic University of America Press 2001).
  • Origen, Commentary on the Epistle to the Romans (Books 6-10), tr. T.P. Scheck (Washington, D.C.: The Catholic University of America Press 2002).

Other Sources

  • Berdyaev, Nicholas, The Beginning and the End, tr. R.M. French (New York: Harper and Brothers 1952).
  • Berdyaev, Nicholas, Slavery and Freedom, tr. R.M. French (New York: Charles Scribner's Sons 1944).
  • Berdyaev, Nicholas, Truth and Revelation, tr. R.M. French (New York: Collier Books 1962).
  • Chadwick, H., Early Christian Thought and the Classical Tradition: Studies in Justin, Clement, and Origen (New York: Oxford University Press 1966).
  • Crouzel, H., Origen: The Life and Thought of the First Great Theologian, tr. A.S. Worrall (T.&T. Clark Ltd. 1989).
  • Dillon, J.M., The Middle Platonists(Ithaca: Cornell University Press 1977).
  • Hardy, E.R., Christology of the Later Fathers (Philadelphia: The Westminster Press 1954).
  • Jonas, H., "Origen's Metaphysics of Free Will, Fall, and Salvation: A 'Divine Comedy' of the Universe," in Philosophical Essays: From Ancient Creed to Technological Man (Englewood Cliffs, NJ: PrenticeHall 1974).
  • Kannengiesser, C., Petersen, W.L., eds., Origen of Alexandria: His World and His Legacy (Indiana: University of Notre Dame Press 1988).
  • Kelly, J.N.D., Early Christian Doctrines (New York: Harper and Row 1978).
  • Louth, A., Maximus the Confessor (New York: Routledge 1996).
  • Luibheid, C., Rorem, P., tr., Pseudo-Dionysius: The Complete Works (Mahwah, NJ: Paulist Press 1987).
  • Meyendorff, J., Christ in Eastern Christian Thought (Crestwood: St. Vladimir's Seminary Press 1975).
  • Murphy, F.X., "Evagrius Ponticus and Origenism," in R. Hanson and H. Crouzel, ed., Origeniana Tertia (1981).
  • O'Meara, D.J., ed., Neoplatonism and Christian Thought (New York: State University of New York Press 1982).
  • Pelikan, J., Christianity and Classical Culture: The Metamorphosis of Natural Theology in the Christian Encounter with Hellenism (New Haven: Yale University Press 1993).
  • Pelikan, J., The Christian Tradition: A History of the Development of Doctrine, vol. 2: "The Spirit of Eastern Christendom (600-1700) (Chicago: University of Chicago Press 1974).
  • Scott, A., Origen and the Life of the Stars: A History of an Idea (Oxford: Clarendon Press 1991).
  • Shaw, G., Theurgy and the Soul: The Neoplatonism of Iamblichus (University Park: Pennsylvania State University Press 1995).
  • Siorvanes, L., Proclus: Neo-Platonic Philosophy and Science (New Haven: Yale University Press 1996).
  • Stevenson, J., ed. A New Eusebius: Documents Illustrative of the History of the Church to A.D. 337 (London: S.P.C.K. 1957).
  • Tatakis, B., Byzantine Philosophy, tr. N.J. Moutafakis (Indianapolis: Hackett 2003).
  • Thunberg, L., Man and the Cosmos: The Vision of St. Maximus the Confessor (Crestwood, NY: St. Vladimir's Seminary Press 1985).
  • Trigg, J.W., Origen: The Bible and Philosophy in the Third-century Church (Atlanta: John Knox Press 1983).
  • Tripolitis, A., The Doctrine of the Soul in the Thought of Plotinus and Origen (New York: Libra 1978).
  • Werner, M., The Formation of Christian Dogma, tr. S.G.F. Brandon ( Harper and Brothers 1957).
  • Williamson, G.A., tr., Eusebius, The History of the Church (New York: Penguin Books 1965).
  • Zeller, E., Outlines of the History of Greek Philosophy, tr. L.R. Palmer (New York: Meridian Books 1955).

Author Information

Edward Moore
St. Elias School of Orthodox Theology
U. S. A.

Protagoras (fl. 5th c. B.C.E.)

Protagoras of Abdera was one of several fifth century Greek thinkers (including also Gorgias, Hippias, and Prodicus) collectively known as the Older Sophists, a group of traveling teachers or intellectuals who were experts in rhetoric (the science of oratory) and related subjects. Protagoras is known primarily for three claims (1) that man is the measure of all things (which is often interpreted as a sort of radical relativism) (2) that he could make the "worse (or weaker) argument appear the better (or stronger)" and (3) that one could not tell if the gods existed or not. While some ancient sources claim that these positions led to his having been tried for impiety in Athens and his books burned, these stories may well have been later legends. Protagoras' notion that judgments and knowledge are in some way relative to the person judging or knowing has been very influential, and is still widely discussed in contemporary philosophy. Protagoras’ influence on the history of philosophy has been significant. Historically, it was in response to Protagoras and his fellow sophists that Plato began the search for transcendent forms or knowledge which could somehow anchor moral judgment. Along with the other Older Sophists and Socrates, Protagoras was part of a shift in philosophical focus from the earlier Presocratic tradition of natural philosophy to an interest in human philosophy. He emphasized how human subjectivity determines the way we understand, or even construct, our world, a position which is still an essential part of the modern philosophic tradition.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Career
  3. Doctrines
    1. Orthoepeia
    2. Man-Measure Statement
    3. Agnosticism
  4. Social Consequences and Immediate Followers
  5. Influence
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Life

Surprising little is known of Protagoras' life with any certainty. Our main sources of information concerning Protagoras are:

  1. Plato (427-347 B.C.E.): Protagoras is a leading character in Plato's dialogue Protagoras and Protagoras' doctrines are discussed extensively in Plato's Theaetetus. Plato's dialogues, however, are a mixture of historical account and artistic license, much in the manner of the comic plays of the period. Moreover, Protagoras died when Plato was quite young and Plato may have depended on not entirely reliable second-hand evidence for his understanding of Protagoras.
  2. Diogenes Laertius (third century C.E.): Diogenes' Lives of the Philosophers is probably our single most extensive source for many early Greek philosophers' works and biographies. Unfortunately, his work was compiled over six hundred years after Protagoras' death and is an uncritical compilation of materials from a wide variety of sources, some reliable, some not, and many hopelessly garbled.
  3. Sextus Empiricus (fl. late 2nd century C.E.): Sextus Empiricus was a skeptic of the Pyrrhonian school. Sextus wrote several books criticizing the dogmatists (non-skeptics). His treatment of Protagoras is somewhat favorable, but since his purpose is to prove the superiority of Pyrrhonism to all other philosophies,we cannot trust him to be "objective" in a modern sense; moreover, like Diogenes, he wrote several hundred years after Protagoras' death and may not have had completely reliable sources.

The first step in understanding Protagoras is to define the general category of "sophist," a term often applied to Protagoras in antiquity. In the fifth century, the term referred mainly to people who were known for their knowledge (for example, Socrates, the seven sages) and those who earned money by teaching advanced pupils (for example, Protagoras, Prodicus) and seemed to be a somewhat neutral term, although sometimes used with pejorative overtones by those who disapproved of the new ideas of the so-called "Sophistic Enlightenment". By the fourth century the term becomes more specialized, limited to those who taught rhetoric, specifically the ability to speak in assemblies or law courts. Because sophistic skills could promote injustice (demagoguery in assemblies, winning unjust lawsuits) as well as justice (persuading the polis to act correctly, allowing the underprivileged to win justice for themselves), the term "sophist" gradually acquired the negative connotation of cleverness not restrained by ethics. Conventionally, the term "Older Sophist" is restricted to a small number of figures known from the Platonic dialogues (Protagoras, Gorgias, Prodicus, Hippias, Euthydemus, Thrasymachus and sometimes others). Whether these figures actually had some common body of doctrines is uncertain. At times scholars have tended to lump them together in a group, and attribute to them all a combination of religious skepticism, skill in argument, epistemological and moral relativism, and a certain degree of intellectual unscrupulousness. These characteristics, though, were probably more typical of their fourth century followers than of the Older Sophists themselves, who tended to agree with and follow generally accepted moral codes, even while their more abstract speculations undermined the epistemological foundations of traditional morality.

When we separate Protagoras from general portraits of "sophistic", as most scholars (for example, the ones listed below in the bibliography) recommend, our information about him is relatively sparse. He was born in approximately 490 B. C. E. in the town of Abdera in Thrace and died c. 420 B. C. E. (place unknown). He traveled around Greece earning his living primarily as a teacher and perhaps advisor and lived in Athens for several years, where he associated with Pericles and other rich and influential Athenians. Pericles invited him to write the constitution for the newly founded Athenian colony of Thurii in 444 B. C. E. Many later legends developed around the life of Protagoras which are probably false, including stories concerning his having studied with Democritus, his trial for impiety, the burning of his books, and his flight from Athens.

2. Career

If our knowledge of Protagoras' life is sparse, our knowledge of his career is vague. Protagoras was probably the first Greek to earn money in higher education and he was notorious for the extremely high fees he charged. His teaching included such general areas as public speaking, criticism of poetry, citizenship, and grammar. His teaching methods seemed to consist primarily of lectures, including model orations, analyses of poems, discussions of the meanings and correct uses of words, and general rules of oratory. His audience consisted mainly of wealthy men, from Athens' social and commercial elites. The reason for his popularity among this class had to do with specific characteristics of the Athenian legal system.

Athens was an extremely litigious society. Not only were various political and personal rivalries normally carried forward by lawsuits, but one special sort of taxation, know as "liturgies" could result in a procedure known as an "antidosis" (exchange). A liturgy was a public expense (such as providinga ship for the navy or supporting a religious festival) assigned to one of the richest men of the community. If a man thought he had been assigned the liturgy unfairly, because there was a richer man able to undertake it, he could bring a lawsuit either to exchange his property with the other man's or to shift the burden of the liturgy to the richer man. Since Athenians had to represent themselves in court rather than hiring lawyers, it was essential that rich men learn to speak well in order to defend their property; if they could not do so, they would be at the mercy of anyone who wanted to extort money from them. While this made the teachings of Protagoras extremely valuable, it also led a certain conservative faction (for example, the comic playwright Aristophanes) to distrust him, in the same way that people now might distrust a slick lawyer.

3. Doctrines

Protagoras' doctrines can be divided into three groups:

  1. Orthoepeia: the study of the correct use of words
  2. Man-measure statement: the notion that knowledge is relative to the knower
  3. Agnosticism: the claim that we cannot know anything about the gods

a. Orthoepeia

Perhaps because the practical side of his teaching was concerned with helping students learn to speak well in the courtroom, Protagoras was interested in "orthoepeia" (the correct use of words). Later sources describe him as one of the first to write on grammar (in the modern sense of syntax) and he seems interested in the correct meaning of words, a specialty often associated with another sophist, Prodicus, as well. In the Protagoras, the Platonic dialogue named after the famous sophist which has both Protagoras and Prodicus as participants, Protagoras is shown interpreting a poem of Simonides, with special concern for the issue of the relationship between the writer's intent and the literal meanings of the words. This method of interpretation was one which would be especially useful in interpreting laws and other written witnesses (contracts, wills, and so forth) in the courtroom. Unfortunately, we don't have any actual writings by Protagoras on the topic.

b. Man-Measure Statement

Of the book titles we have attributed to Protagoras, only two, "Truth" (or "Refutations") and "On the Gods" are probably accurate. Of Protagoras' works, only a few brief quotations embedded in the works of later authors have survived. (The quotations of and reports about Protagoras below are referred to by their 'Diels-Kranz,' or 'DK' number, the usual way of referring to such fragments and testimonia. The Diels-Kranz numbering system is explained here.) Of Protagoras' ipsissima verba (actual words, as opposed to paraphrases), the most famous is the homo-mensura (man-measure) statement (DK80b1): "Of all things the measure is man, of the things that are, that [or "how"] they are, and of things that are not, that [or "how"] they are not." This precise meaning of this statement, like that of any short extract taken out of context, is far from obvious, although the long discussion of it in Plato's Theaetetus gives us some sense of how ancient Greek audiences interpreted it. The test case normally used is temperature. If Ms. X. says "it is hot," then the statement (unless she is lying) is true for her. Another person, Ms. Y, may simultaneously claim "it is cold." This statement could also be true for her. If Ms. X normally lives in Alaska and Ms. Y in Florida, the same temperature (e. g. 25 Celsius) may seem hot to one and cool to the other. The measure of hotness or coldness is fairly obviously the individual person. One cannot legitimately tell Ms. X she does not feel hot -- she is the only person who can accurately report her own perceptions or sensations. In this case, it is indeed impossible to contradict as Protagoras is held to have said (DK80a19). But what if Ms. Y, in claiming it feels cold, suggests that unless the heat is turned on the pipes will freeze? One might suspect that she has a fever and her judgment is unreliable; the measure may still be the individual person, but it is an unreliable one, like a broken ruler or unbalanced scale. In a modern scientific culture, with a predilection for scientific solutions, we would think of consulting a thermometer to determine the objective truth. The Greek response was to look at the more profound philosophical implications.

Even if the case of whether the pipes will freeze can be solved trivially, the problem of it being simultaneously hot and cold to two women remains interesting. If this cannot be resolved by determining that one has a fever, we are presented with evidence that judgments about qualities are subjective. If this is the case though, it has alarming consequences. Abstractions like truth, beauty, justice, and virtue are also qualities and it would seem that Protagoras' dictum would lead us to conclude that they too are relative to the individual observer, a conclusion which many conservative Athenians found alarming because of its potential social consequences. If good and bad are merely what seem good and bad to the individual observer, then how can one claim that stealing or adultery or impiety or murder are somehow wrong? Moreover, if something can seem both hot and cold (or good and bad) then both claims, that the thing is hot and that the thing is cold, can be argued for equally well. If adultery is both good and bad (good for one person and bad for another), then one can construct equally valid arguments for and against adultery in general or an individual adulterer. What will make a case triumph in court is not some inherent worth of one side, but the persuasive artistry of the orator. And so, Protagoras claims he is able to "make the worse case the better" (DK80b6). The oratorical skills Protagoras taught thus had potential for promoting what most Athenians considered injustice or immorality.

c. Agnosticism

While the pious might wish to look to the gods to provide absolute moral guidance in the relativistic universe of the Sophistic Enlightenment, that certainty also was cast into doubt by philosophic and sophistic thinkers, who pointed out the absurdity and immorality of the conventional epic accounts of the gods. Protagoras' prose treatise about the gods began "Concerning the gods, I have no means of knowing whether they exist or not or of what sort they may be. Many things prevent knowledge including the obscurity of the subject and the brevity of human life." (DK80b4)

4. Social Consequences and Immediate Followers

As a consequence of Protagoras' agnosticism and relativism, he may have considered that laws (legislative and judicial) were things which evolved gradually by agreement (brought about by debate in democratic assemblies) and thus could be changed by further debate. This position would imply that there was a difference between the laws of nature and the customs of humans. Although Protagoras himself seemed to respect, and even revere the customs of human justice (as a great achievement), some of the younger followers of Protagoras and the other Older Sophists concluded that the arbitrary nature of human laws and customs implies that they can be ignored at will, a position that was held to be one of the causes of the notorious amorality of such figures as Alcibiades.

Protagoras himself was a fairly traditional and upright moralist. He may have viewed his form of relativism as essentially democratic — allowing people to revise unjust or obsolete laws, defend themselves in court, free themselves from false certainties -- but he may equally well have considered rhetoric a way in which the elite could counter the tendencies towards mass rule in the assemblies. Our evidence on this matter is unfortunately minimal.

The consequences of the radical skepticism of the sophistic enlightenment appeared, at least to Plato and Aristophanes, among others, as far from benign. In Aristophanes' play, the Clouds, a teacher of rhetoric (called Socrates, but with doctrines based to a great degree on those of the Sophists, and possibly directed specifically at Protagoras or his followers) teaches that the gods don't exist, moral values are not fixed, and how to make the weaker argument appear the stronger. The result is moral chaos -- the main characters (Strepsiades and his son Pheidippides) in Clouds are portrayed as learning clever tricks to enable them to cheat their creditors and eventually abandoning all sense of conventional morality (illustrated by Pheidippides beating his father on stage and threatening to beat his mother). Although no one accused Protagoras himself of being anything other than honest -- even Plato, who disapproved of his philosophical positions, portrays him as generous, courteous, and upright -- his techniques were adopted by various unscrupulous characters in the following generation, giving sophistry the bad name it still has for clever (but fallacious) verbal trickery.

5. Influence

Protagoras' influence on the history of philosophy has been significant. Historically, it was in response to Protagoras and his fellow sophists that Plato began the search for transcendent forms or knowledge which could somehow anchor moral judgment. Along with the other Older Sophists and Socrates, Protagoras was part of a shift in philosophical focus from the earlier Presocratic tradition of natural philosophy to an interest in human philosophy. He emphasized how human subjectivity determines the way we understand, or even construct, our world, a position which is still an essential part of the modern philosophic tradition.

6. References and Further Reading

a. Primary sources

  • Aristophanes. Clouds. Intro. and trans. by Carol Poster. In Aristophanes 3, ed. David Slavitt and Palmer Bovie. Philadelphia PA: University of Pennsylvania Press, 1999: 85-192.
  • Diels, Hermann. Die Fragmente der Vorsokratiker. Rev. Walther Kranz. Berlin: Weidmann, 1972-1973.
  • Diogenes Laertius. Lives Of Eminent Philosophers. Trans. R. D. Hicks. 2 vols. Cambridge MA: Harvard University Press, 1959.
  • Plato. Plato II: Laches, Protagoras, Meno, Euthydemus. Trans. W. R. M. Lamb. Cambridge MA: Harvard University Press, 1967.
  • Plato. Plato VII: Theaetetus, Sophist. Trans. H. N. Fowler. Cambridge MA: Harvard University Press, 1925.
  • Sextus Empiricus. Sextus Empiricus. Trans. R. G. Bury. 4 vols. Cambridge MA: Harvard University Press, 1953-59.
  • Sprague, Rosamund Kent, ed. The Older Sophists: A Complete Translation by Several Hands. Columbia SC: University of South Carolina Press, 1972.

b. Secondary sources

  • Guthrie, W. K. C. The Sophists. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1971
  • de Romilly, Jaqueline. The Great Sophists In Periclean Athens. Trans. Janet Lloyd. Oxford: The Clarendon Press, 1992.
  • Kennedy, George. The Art Of Persuasion In Greece. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1963.
  • Kerferd, G. B. The Sophistic Movement. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1981.
  • Rankin, H. D. Sophists, Socratics & Cynics. London: Croom Helm, 1983.
  • Schiappa, Edward. Protagoras and Logos. Columbia S.C.: University of South Carolina Press 1991.

Author Information

Carol Poster
Florida State University
U. S. A.

Pseudo-Dionysius the Areopagite (fl. c. 650—c. 725 C.E.)

Dionysius is the author of three long treatises (The Divine Names, The Celestial Hierarchy, and The Ecclesiastical Hierarchy) one short treatise (The Mystical Theology) and ten letters expounding various aspects of Christian Philosophy from a mystical and Neoplatonic perspective. Presenting himself as Dionysius the Areopagite, the disciple of Paul mentioned in Acts 17:34, his writings had the status of apostolic authority until the 19th century when studies had shown the writings denoted a marked influence from the Athenian Neoplatonic school of Proclus and thus were probably written ca. 500.  Although the attribution of authorship has proven to be a falsification, the unknown author (hereafter referred to as Ps-Dionysius) has not lost his credibility as an articulate Athenian Neoplatonist expressing an authentic Christian mystical tradition. Indeed with eloquent poetic language and strong exposition of ideas, the Dionysian corpus ranks among the classics of western spirituality.

Table of Contents

  1. History and Development of Christian Platonism up to Pseudo-Dionysius
  2. Mystery Schools, Gnosticism, Hermeticism, and the "Platonic Underground"
  3. The Works of Dionysius the Areopagite
    1. The Divine Names (13 Chapters)
    2. The Mystical Theology (5 Chapters)
    3. The Celestial Hierarchy (15 Chapters)
    4. The Ecclesiastical Hierarchy (7 Chapters)
    5. The Epistles (10 Letters)
  4. The Dionysian Influence
    1. Philosophy
    2. Mysticism
    3. Occultism (Esoteric traditions of Alchemy, Hermetism, Kabbalah)
  5. References and Further Reading

1. History and Development of Christian Platonism up to Pseudo-Dionysius

Born within a 500-year old Graeco-Roman culture, Christianity received a pervasive influence from the then 400-year old Platonist tradition very early on. Despite the official outlawing of so-called pagan philosophy in the 6th century, Platonism or Neoplatonism, continued to maintain a dynamically evolving influence for the ensuing thousand years within the sphere of Christianity and beyond that, interest in Platonism is waxing strong today. In general, the prominent early Christian Platonists were men already possessing a classical Graeco-Roman culture and schooled in the Middle Platonic tradition and who would subsequently convert to Christianity thus bringing their background and knowledge to the service of their new faith. Already, Philo of Alexandria (20 BC - 40 AD) had developed an extensive Middle Platonic interpretation of the Jewish scriptures (scriptural symbology, logos theology, moral philosophy, etc.). With the solid framework provided by Philo, Alexandria became the home of the first Christian Platonists: Clement (160 - 220) and Origen (185 -253) who both in their own way crafted a considerable system of correspondences between Platonism and Christianity. The influence of Neoplatonism can be seen with the Cappadocian fathers Basil (330-379), Gregory Nazianzus (329 - 389), and Gregory of Nyssa (331/40 - ca. 395); as well as Synesius of Cyrene (373? - 414). Origen's influence continued with the fathers of the Egyptian desert, Macarius (295 - 386), Evagrius Pontus (345 - 399), and John Cassian (+350). The Neoplatonic influence appears in the Latin Church with Marius Victorinus (281/291- ?), Ambrose (354 - 450), Augustine (354 - 430),  and Boethius (460? - 524). Philiponus (fl. 500?) is a Christian Neoplatonist who studied with the last teachers of the pagan Athenian school.

2. Mystery Schools, Gnosticism, Hermeticism, and the "Platonic Underground"

In accordance with his Neoplatonic background, Ps-Dionysius adopts the initiation language of the Mystery religions. Basically, the Mystery religions can be considered as the esoteric counterpart to the exoteric popular religions. The symbols and mythology of popular cults of worship are thought to contain an esoteric meaning which reveal a deeper mystical knowledge. The pledge of secrecy being integral to the Mystery religions, comparatively little information about them has come down to us. There seems to be a stock of similar myths, symbols, and ritual common to all of them and their influence was pervasive in both the Pagan and Christian world:

The Soul was the one subject, and the knowledge of the Soul the one object of all the ancient Mysteries. In the 'Fall' of PISTIS-SOPHIA, and her rescue by her Syzygy, JESUS, we see the ever-enacted drama of the suffering and ignorant Personality, which can only be saved by the immortal Individuality or rather by its own yearning towards IT (H. P. Blavatsky, "Commentary on the Pistis-Sophia," in Collected Writings, Vol. XIII, The Theosophical Publishing House, Wheaton: 1982, p. 40).

The Neoplatonic schools at this period can be considered to represent a middle ground between the pagan esoteric cults  [Hellenic Mysteries, Oriental Mystery cults (Mithraism, Attis), Hermetism, Greek alchemists (Zosimos)] and the popular state forms of religious worship. Whether a Christian Neoplatonist such as Ps-Dionysius played a similar mediating role between the exoteric forms of Judeo-Christianity (popular Roman Catholic state religion) and esoteric Christianity (Gnosticism, Arianism, Docetism) would be a matter of conjecture, but what is interesting is how the Dionysian corpus formulates a creative philosophical synthesis that reflects a more open Christian position in a period when all the above-mentioned religious movements where in a very dynamic state of ferment and conflict which saw the rise of Christianity and the waning of Paganism.

3. The Works of Dionysius the Areopagite

There are five works ascribed to Dionysius:  The Divine Names, The Mystical Theology, The Celestial Hierarchy, The Ecclesiastical Hierarchy and his Epistles.  All of these works are interrelated and, taken together, form a complex whole.  Paul Rorem gives a very good overview of how these works unfold:

The point here is that not all affirmations concerning God are equally inappropriate; they are arranged in a descending order of decreasing congruity.  Affirmative theology begins with the loftier, more congruous comparisons and then proceeds "down" to the less appropriate ones.  Thus, as the author reminds us, The Theological Representations [not extant] began with God's oneness and proceeded down into the multiplicity of affirming the Trinity and the incarnation.  The Divine Names then affirmed the more numerous designations for God which come from mental concepts, while The Symbolic Theology [not extant] "descended" into the still more pluralized realm of sense perception and its plethora of symbols for the deity.  This pattern of descending affirmations and ascending negations can be interpreted in terms of late Neoplatonism's "procession" from the One down into plurality and the "return" of all back to the One. In the "return," not all negations concerning God are equally appropriate; the attributes to be negated are arranged in an ascending order of decreasing incongruity, first considering and negating the lowest or most obviously false statements about God and then moving up to deny these that may seem more congruous.  Thus the first to be denied are the perceptible attributes, starting with The Mystical Theology, Chapter 4, which therefore previews the two subsequent treatises on perceptible symbols, The Celestial Hierarchy and The Ecclesiastical Hierarchy.  Chapter 2 of the former work will continue the theme of negating and transcending symbols, namely, interpreting first the most incongruous of the perceptible symbols attributed to the celestial, whether to the angels or to God.  The anagogical or uplifting method of interpretation in these two treatises incorporates into itself the principles of negative theology.  Both the spatial, material depiction of the angels in the scriptures and also the temporal, sequential images of God in the liturgy must be transcended in the ascent from the perceptible to the intelligible.  Thus, "as we climb higher," Chapter 5 of The Mystical Theology denies and moves beyond all our concepts or "conceptual" attributes of God and concludes by abandoning all speech and thought, even negations. (Pseudo-Dionysius, The Complete Works,  New York: Paulist Press 1987, p.140 note).

a. The Divine Names (13 Chapters)

Chapter 1 Dionysius the Elder to Timothy the Fellow Elder:  What the goal of this discourse is, and the tradition regarding the divine names. A general introduction in which God is considered omniscient, beyond all human understanding and description and therefore can only be expressed through symbols, names which are found in the scriptures.  One can approach the truth of God through contemplation of the Divine Symbols. The conception of God is a philosophical one, akin to  the One, or the Good of  Neoplatonism, and not  anthropomorphic Old Testament God of popular theology.

Chapter 2 Concerning the unified and differentiated Word of God, and what the divine unity and differentiation is.
The Neoplatonic concept of emanation finds its counterpart in the "divine procession."  Jesus Christ is considered to be a mystery that is beyond human contemplation.

Chapter 3 The power of praying, concerning the blessed Hierotheus, piety and our theology. Here the author speaks of his teacher Hierotheus and refers to a work of his entitled "Elements of Theology" which is not extant.

Chapter 4 Concerning "God," "Light," "Beautiful," "Love," "Ecstasy," and "Zeal" and that evil is neither a being, nor from a being, nor in beings. Here begins the metaphysical explanations of the Divine Names taken from the scriptures.  Also explained is the mystical concept of "yearning" for union with the Good and the Beautiful.  The philosophical explanation of evil is evidently much more Platonic than the anthropomorphic concept of evil as expressed by the conventional church dogma. (The parallels on the discussion of evil to the De Malorum Subsistentia of Proclus provided the initial clues in proving the pseudonymous authorship.)

Chapter 5 Concerning "Being" and also concerning paradigms. The metaphysical causes of Being are discussed.

Chapter 6 Concerning "Life." The transcendent, absolute, eternal nature of life is dealt with.

Chapter 7 Concerning "Wisdom," "Mind," "Truth," "Faith." The basis of a divine, transcendent wisdom where humans derive their intelligence and understanding through participation with the Divine Mind is discussed.

Chapter 8 Concerning "Power," "Righteousness," "Salvation," "Redemption," and also inequality. This chapter deals with the ordering of the universe according to divine laws by which a transcendent order maintains the dynamic harmony of all things.

Chapter 9 Concerning greatness and smallness, sameness and difference, similarity and dissimilarity, rest, motion, equality. It is shown how the fundamental unity of God can be seen in the multiplicity of the universe at the macrocosmic and microcosmic levels.

Chapter 10 Concerning "Omnipotent,"  "Ancient of Days," and also concerning "Eternity" and "Time." This chapter deals with the philosophical aspects of time and eternity.

Chapter 11 Concerning "Peace," and what is intended by "being itself," "power itself" and things said in this vein. The intelligent harmony which brings things together in a communion of concord is discussed.

Chapter 12 Concerning "Holy of Holies," "King of Kings," "Lord of Lords," "God of Gods." Holy of Holies deals with Purity; Kingship, with law and order; Lordship, stability through possession of the Good and the Beautiful, God, Providence which sees everything.

Chapter 13 Concerning "Perfect"  and "One." Here is a synthesis of the whole work, returning to the idea of the One as discussed in Neoplatonic terms.

b. The Mystical Theology (5 Chapters)

Chapter 1 An explanation of Ps-Dionysius' negative theology in which one rises to high levels of divine contemplation by defining God by what it is not because it is beyond assertion and denial.

Chapter 2 How one should be united to, and attribute praises to the cause of all things which is beyond all things.

Chapter 3 What are the affirmative theologies and what are the negative.  The higher we rise towards the transcendent, the more language fails to describe it.

Chapter 4 That the supreme cause of every perceptible thing is not itself perceptible.  The negative theology begins by denying it all formal existence perceptible by the senses.

Chapter 5 It is stated that the supreme Cause of every conceptual thing is not itself conceptual.  We are to apprehend it by rising to the highest concepts and then going beyond where neither assertion nor denial can be attributed to it.

c. The Celestial Hierarchy (15 Chapters)

Chapter 1 That every divine illumination, descending with goodness and according to different modes to the object of its providence, remains nonetheless simple, and indeed unifies what it illumines. The treatise begins with an explanation of the value of the symbol as a representation of spiritual essences.

Chapter 2 It is appropriate to reveal the mysteries of God and of heaven with symbols without resemblance. Here it is explained that the many images and symbols in the Bible are not meant to be taken at dead letter face value.  As man is incapable of contemplating Divine Truth directly, our divinely inspired ancestors have left us symbols adapted to our capacity of understanding which help us to raise our consciousness to the understanding and contemplation of the divine truths;  the second function of the symbol is that it also serves as a veil to these sacred truths for those who it would be imprudent to reveal these things to.  The value of the symbol therefore depends on the person's capacity to penetrate its secrets.

Chapter 3 In what does the Hierarchy consist of and what is its use. The notion of hierarchy is that seeing that not everyone can equally directly contemplate and participate in the supreme cause, there is therefore a great chain of hierarchies emanating from the most spiritual origins down to the most material planes.  To undertake the divine ascension, there are intermediaries for every level of reality like the steps on a ladder.  The higher hierarchies, receiving a more direct illumination, can transmit that light to the lower hierarchies at the level they are able to perceive it and the higher hierarchies also serve as an accessible image of the transcendent, an example for the hierarchy immediately below, whose members can contemplate in order to rise to a higher level.  The closer a hierarchy is to the source of divine light, the greater the degree of purity and simplicity and resemblance to the source.

Chapter 4 What the names given to the angels signify. An interesting point concerning the hierarchies is that no human being can directly contemplate the ultimate Source.  Even Moses did not have a direct vision of God but rather a vision adapted to his level of perception.  It is shown how the incarnation of Christ was done in accord with the hierarchical order of angels.

Chapter 5 Why are all the celestial essences distinctly called angels. On the hierarchical scales the angels are at the lowest degree of the hierarchy.  This is because the higher levels contain all the illumination and power of the lower levels; but the lower do not have the same level of participation with the higher.  Therefore the term angel is used because, in a sense, it is the lowest common denominator.

Chapter 6 What is the first order of the celestial essences, what is the middle order and what is the inferior order.
All the names of the hierarchies appear in the scriptures.  They are divided into three groups of three hierarchies each:

First - Seraphim, Cherubim and Thrones
Second - Dominions, Virtues and Powers
Third - Principalities, Archangels and Angels

Chapter 7 Of the Seraphim, the Cherubim and the Thrones and of the first hierarchy that they constitute. The meaning of the first three angelic hierarchies are as follows:

Seraphim - Fire, "Those who burn"
Cherubim - Messengers of knowledge, Wisdom
Thrones - Seat of God

Chapter 8 Of the Dominions, the Virtues and the Powers and the middle hierarchy that they constitute. The meaning of the second order of the hierarchies are as follows:

Dominions - Justice
Virtues - Courage, Virility
Powers - Order, Harmony

Chapter 9 Of the Principalities, the Archangels and the Angels and of the last hierarchy that they constitute. The meaning of the third order are as follows:

Principalities - Authority
Archangels - Unity
Angels - Revelation, messengers

Chapter 10 Recapitulation and conclusion concerning the proper ordering of the angelic hierarchy. Each order, therefore has in itself three orders - first, middle and last.  It is said that none of the orders are totally perfect; all the hierarchies thus mutually participate in a constant  march, striving towards perfection.

Chapter 11 Why all the celestial essences receive in common the name of the celestial powers. The celestial powers have three qualities - essence, power and act.

Chapter 12 Why do the highest of high priests receive the name of angels. Why are priests called angels?  Because although the lower orders do not participate of the higher orders per se, the illuminations of the higher orders do radiate all the way through to the lowest orders in a gradually decreasing brightness, therefore it can be said that the lower can receive the light of the higher in an indirect manner.

Chapter 13 Why is it said that it is the Seraphim that purified the prophet Isaiah. In the Bible, when Isaiah was purified by a Seraphim, it is not to be understood that he was in direct contact with such an immeasurably high order; what is meant is that the illuminating properties and powers of the order of the Seraphim had descended through the several intermediary orders to purify Isaiah.  It is a question of opacity and translucency in regards to the light.  Light shines and its rays can pass through substances depending on its degree of translucency, will reflect more or less of the light.  This analogy applies to human consciousness in relation to divine light.

Chapter 14 What does the number attributed to the angels signify. It is stated that there are an immeasurable number of angels in every order, and therefore a truly infinite number of angels are acting in the various planes of the universe.  There is an angel overlooking the welfare of every nation as well.

Chapter 15 What are the figurative images of the angelic powers. This chapter discusses the various symbols in reference to the angelic functions such as fire; man; infant; sacred clothes and instruments; air, wind and clouds; metals and stones; animals.

d. The Ecclesiastical Hierarchy (7 Chapters)

Chapter 1 What is the tradition of the ecclesiastical hierarchy and what is its purpose. It is explained how the tradition began initially with a divine transmission of sacred symbols and forms which were thereafter transmitted to succeeding generations.

Chapter 2. 1 The rite of illumination.
The goal of the hierarchy is "greatest likeness and union with god through obedience of the commandments and doing the sacred acts."  And the first initiation is the divine birth, meaning birth to a spiritual life.

2.2 A postulant who wishes to enter the spiritual life has a sponsor who presents him to the hierarch.  The postulant goes through various ritual gestures including being anointed with oil and immersed in water three times.  It is a baptism.

2.3 This is a practical applications of the symbols.  The rituals are not merely functional gestures but are meant to convey actual transformation processes in the candidates consciousness.  For example, the immersion in water symbolizes a dissolution of the old material way of life to reemerge into the spiritual which is further symbolized by putting on bright new clothes and fragrant ointments. Firm opposition to whatever hinders our communion, brave resolution in striving to uplift oneself and a will for victory over the forces of death and destruction is stressed.

Chapter 3.1 The rite of the synaxis.
Or the Eucharist.  What these initiation operations do is by granting communion, it gives the participants an inner unity by gathering together the divided  and scattered  fragments of our consciousness.

3.2 Mystery of the synaxis or communion. The Eucharist is the ritual re-enactment of the last supper.

3.3 A symbolic explanation of the Eucharist is explained as well as the value of Christ's example that we should strive to imitate.  There is also different levels of participation in the ceremonies according to one's level of purification, clarity of vision, and freedom from fantasies.

Chapter 4.1 The ritual of ointment and what is perfected by it. The ointment is the third of the three holy sacraments explained.

4.2 Mystery of the sacred ointment. This consists in consecrating the sacred ointment used for almost all the sacraments of sanctification and rites of consecration.

4.3 Perfecting and consecrating with ointment - symbolizes a visitation of the Divine Spirit.

Chapter 5.1 Concerning the clerical orders, powers, activities, and consecrations. Here are three orders which are a reflection of the triple order of the celestial hierarchy.  And these orders have a further triple division.  Furthermore they have a triple power of purification, illumination  and perfection.

1-  Hierarchs - Sanctification of clerical orders, consecration of ointment  and rite of purification and consecration of the Holy butter.
2-  Priests - Illumination
3-  Deacons -  Purification

5.2 The mystery of the clerical consecrations of the three orders. The various rites of consecration of the three orders are explained.

5.3 The hierarch does not work the consecration through his own personal authority but is rather an intermediary for the Divine Powers.

Chapter 6.1 Concerning the orders of those being initiated. Various categories of candidates who will approach the mysteries are detailed:

1-  The three orders of candidates receiving direct instruction (incubation, instruction).
2-  Those who fell away and are returning to the church.
3-  Those who are weak, fearful and require strengthening.
4-  Those who have lived a life of  sin and need  sanctification.
5-  Those who are attentive to the spiritual life but lack firmness in practice.

There is then an intermediate level - those ready to enter upon the path of contemplation; candidate priests for illumination.
There is also the order of monks - they are considered purified and have complete power and holiness in its own activities within the hierarchies.

6.2 Mystery of the consecration of a monk. The monastic profession and tonsure is explained.

6.3 Renunciation of all activities in act and thought that distract from the sacred life is  stressed.  The correspondence of purification, illumination and perfection with the celestial hierarchies is explained.

Chapter 7.1 The rite for the dead. Dying is called a sacred rebirth.

7.2 Mystery regarding those who died sacredly. The rites are explained for those who belong to the orders.

7.3 The rewards are not equal for all. One will live in a state of blessedness in the afterlife corresponding to the degree of saintliness one has achieved in material life. This  treatise closes on a point concerning baptism of children.  The idea of baptism at a young age is that it is considered good to develop sacred habits at a young age and the baptism is effected only if it is agreed that the child be entrusted to a spiritual parent who will afterwards provide them with a religious education.

e. The Epistles (10 Letters)

Letter 1 - To the monk, Gaius- Deals with negative theology.

Letter 2 - To the monk, Gaius- Is a discussion on the Good.

Letter 3 - To the monk, Gaius- Deals with the mystery of Jesus.

Letter 4 - To the monk, Gaius- Of the transcendent character of Jesus; the humanity of Jesus is emphasized.

Letter 5 - To Dorotheus, deacon- Deals with negative theology.

Letter 6 - To Sosipater, Priest- Denis is against the denunciation of cults who express a different point of view than Christianity.

Letter 7 - To Polycarp, a hierarch-  Regarding a discussion with Apollophanes, a sophist, Ps-Dionysius counsels not to refute his opinions but simply establish the truth as clearly as he can and let the validity of his explanations stand for themselves.  There is a reference to the Mithraic cult as well as to various Christian miracles.

Letter 8 To Demophilus, a monk-  This is the longest of the letters and concerns a monk who turned away a repenting sinner who wished to return to the church.  Ps-Dionysius disapproves  of the monk's actions and extols the virtue of meekness, kindness and tolerance in which reason governs anger.  There are also many details concerning the practical functioning of the ecclesiastical hierarchy and the authority and respect that the respective ranks should command.  The letter ends with a personal relating of a miraculous vision of a certain Carpos illustrating the  mercifulness of Jesus.

Letter 9 To Titus, Hierarch-  A question concerning the symbolism of the mixing bowl and food and drink as spiritual nourishment is dealt with.

Letter 10 To John the theologian- In this letter, words of comfort and support to an exiled apostle are conveyed.

4. The Dionysian Influence

The Dionysian corpus has had an wide influence on various aspects of Christian thought. The following list is divided into three general currents of influence:  philosophy, mysticism and occultism. By no means comprehensive, this list aims to simply give a general overview of some prominent thinkers in the Christian Platonist tradition. The three categories are very general and the categorization loose, as many people on this list could easily overlap into several categories.

a. Philosophy

Maximus Confessor (580 - 662), Alcuin (730 - 806), John Scotus Eriugena (fl. 850), Michael Psellus (1018 - 1096), Hugh of St-Victor (+1141), Richard of St-Victor (+1173), Thomas Aquinas (1125 - 1274), Thiery of Chartres (fl. 1142 -1150), Robert Grosseteste (1175 - ca. 1225?) Bonaventure (1221 - 1274), Gemisthos Plethon (ca. 1370? - 1450), Nicholas of Cusa (1401 - 1464), Denis the Carthusian (1402 - 1471), Marsilio Ficino (1433 - 1499), Lefebvre d'Etaples (1436 -1520), Thomas Vaughan (1622 - 1666).

b. Mysticism

Bernard of Clairvaux (1091 -1153), Hildegarde of Bingen (1098 - 1179), Jacopone da Todi (1128 -  1306), Meister Eckhart (1260 - 1327), John Tauler (1300 -1361), Henry Suso (ca. 1295 - 1365), John Ruysbroeck (1293 - 1381), Henry de Mayle (ca. 1360 - 1415), Catherine of Sienna (1347 -1380), Jean Gerson (1363 - 1409), Francisco de Orsuna (+1540), Teresa of Avila (1515 - 1582), John of the Cross (1515 - 1582), Augustine Baker (1575 -1641), unknown author of the Cloud of Unknowing (ca. 1350 - 1395)

c. Occultism (Esoteric traditions of Alchemy, Hermetism, Kabbalah)

Albert the Great (1206 - 1240), Roger Bacon (1210/14 - ca. 1292), Dante (1265 - 1321), Ramon Lully (1232 - 1316?), Johannes Reuchlin (1455 -1522), Johannes Trithemius (1462 -1516), Pico de la Mirandola (1463 - 1494), Francesco Giorgi (1466 -1540),  Cornelius Agrippa (1486 - 1534), John Dee (1537 -1608), Giordano Bruno (1548 - 1600), Robert Fludd (1574-1637) Jacob Boehme (1575 - 1624), William Law (1686 -1761), Eckhartausen (1752 -1803), Louis-Claude de St-Martin (1743 -1803), William Blake (1757 -1827).

5. References and Further Reading

  • Dillon, John, The Middle Platonists, Duckworth, Great Britain, 1977.
  • Ferguson, Everett  (ed.), Encyclopedia of Early Christianity, Garland Publishing, New York, 1990.
  • Finan, Thomas; Twaney, Vincent (eds.), The Relationship between Neoplatonism and Christianity, Four Courts Press, Dublin, 1992.
  • Luibheid, Colm (transl.), Pseudo-Dionysius: The Complete Works, Paulist Press (Classics of Western Spirituality), New York, 1987.
  • Livraga, Jorge Angel, Manuel d'Introduction aux philosophies d'orient et d'occident, Nouvelle Acropole, France.
  • O'Leary, Dominic J., Neoplatonism and Christian Thought, State University Press, New York, 1982.
  • Underhill, Evelyn, Mysticism, Meridian, Noonday Press, New-York, 1955.
  • Yates, Frances A., Giordano Bruno and the Hermetic Tradition, Routledge and Kegan Paul, London. 1964.

Author Information

Mark Lamarre
U. S. A.

Philo of Alexandria (c. 20 B.C.E.—40 C.E.)

Philo_of_AlexandriaPhilo of Alexandria, a Hellenized Jew also called Judaeus Philo, is a figure that spans two cultures, the Greek and the Hebrew. When Hebrew mythical thought met Greek philosophical thought in the first century B.C.E. it was only natural that someone would try to develop speculative and philosophical justification for Judaism in terms of Greek philosophy. Thus Philo produced a synthesis of both traditions developing concepts for future Hellenistic interpretation of messianic Hebrew thought, especially by Clement of Alexandria, Christian Apologists like Athenagoras, Theophilus, Justin Martyr, Tertullian, and by Origen. He may have influenced Paul, his contemporary, and perhaps the authors of the Gospel of John (C. H. Dodd) and the Epistle to the Hebrews (R. Williamson and H. W. Attridge). In the process, he laid the foundations for the development of Christianity in the West and in the East, as we know it today. Philo's primary importance is in the development of the philosophical and theological foundations of Christianity. The church preserved the Philonic writings because Eusebius of Caesarea labeled the monastic ascetic group of Therapeutae and Therapeutrides, described in Philo's The Contemplative Life, as Christians, which is highly unlikely. Eusebius also promoted the legend that Philo met Peter in Rome. Jerome (345-420 C.E.) even lists him as a church Father. Jewish tradition was uninterested in philosophical speculation and did not preserve Philo's thought. According to H. A. Wolfson, Philo was a founder of religious philosophy, a new habit of practicing philosophy. Philo was thoroughly educated in Greek philosophy and culture as can be seen from his superb knowledge of classical Greek literature. He had a deep reverence for Plato and referred to him as "the most holy Plato" (Prob. 13). Philo's philosophy represented contemporary Platonism which was its revised version incorporating Stoic doctrine and terminology via Antiochus of Ascalon (ca 90 B.C.E.) and Eudorus of Alexandria, as well as elements of Aristotelian logic and ethics and Pythagorean ideas. Clement of Alexandria even called Philo "the Pythagorean."  But it seems that Philo also picked up his ancestral tradition, though as an adult, and once having discovered it, he put forward the teachings of the Jewish prophet, Moses, as "the summit of philosophy" (Op. 8), and considered Moses the teacher of Pythagoras (b. ca 570 B.C.E.) and of all Greek philosophers and lawgivers (Hesiod, Heraclitus, Lycurgus, to mention a few). For Philo, Greek philosophy was a natural development of the revelatory teachings of Moses. He was no innovator in this matter because already before him Jewish scholars attempted the same. Artapanus in the second century B.C.E identified Moses with Musaeus and with Orpheus. According to Aristobulus of Paneas (first half of the second century B.C.E.), Homer and Hesiod drew from the books of Moses which were translated into Greek long before the Septuagint.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Philo's Works and Their Classification
  3. Technique of Exposition
  4. Emphasis on Contemplative Life and Philosophy
  5. Philosophy and Wisdom: a Path to Ethical Life
  6. Philo's Ethical Doctrine
  7. Philo's Mysticism and Transcendence of God
  8. Source of Intuition of the Infinite Reality
  9. Philo's Doctrine of Creation
    1. Philo's Model of Creation
    2. Eternal Creation
  10. Doctrine of Miracles: Naturalism and Comprehension
  11. Doctrine of the Logos in Philo's Writings
    1. The Utterance of God
    2. The Divine Mind
    3. God's Transcendent Power
    4. First-born Son of God
    5. Universal Bond: in the Physical World and in the Human Soul
    6. Immanent Reason
    7. Immanent Mediator of the Physical Universe
    8. The Angel of the Lord, Revealer of God
    9. Multi-Named Archetype
    10. Soul-Nourishing Manna and Wisdom
    11. Intermediary Power
    12. "God"
    13. Summary of Philo's Concept of the Logos
  12. List of abbreviations to Philo's works
  13. Editions of Philo's works and their translations
  14. Major Works on Philo

1. Life

Very little is known about the life of Philo. He lived in Alexandria, which at that time counted, according to some estimates, about one million people and included largest Jewish community outside of Palestine. He came from a wealthy and the prominent family and appears to be a leader in his community. Once he visited Jerusalem and the temple, as he himself stated in Prov. 2.64. Philo's brother, Alexander, was a wealthy, prominent Roman government official, a custom agent responsible for collecting dues on all goods imported into Egypt from the East. He donated money to plate the gates of the temple in Jerusalem with gold and silver. He also made a loan to Herod Agrippa I, grandson of Herod the Great.  Alexander's two sons, Marcus and Tiberius Julius Alexander were involved in Roman affairs. Marcus married Bernice,  the daughter of Herod Agrippa I, who is mentioned in Acts (25:13, 23; 26:30). The other son, Tiberius Julius Alexander, described by Josephus as "not remaining true to his ancestral practices" became procurator of the province of Judea (46-48 C.E.) and prefect of Egypt (66-70 C.E.). Philo was involved in the affairs of his community which interrupted his contemplative life (Spec. leg. 3.1-6), especially during the crisis relating to the pogrom which was initiated in 38 C.E. by the prefect Flaccus, during the reign of emperor Gaius Caligula. He was elected to head the Jewish delegation, which apparently included his brother Alexander and nephew Tiberius Julius Alexander, and was sent to Rome in 39-40 B.C.E. to see the emperor. He reported the events in his writings Against Flaccus and The Embassy to Gaius.

2. Philo's Works and Their Classification

The major part of Philo's writings consists of philosophical essays dealing with the main themes of biblical thought that present a systematic and precise exposition of his views. One has the impression that he attempted to show that the philosophical Platonic or Stoic ideas were nothing but the deductions made from the biblical verses of Moses. Philo was not an original thinker, but he was well acquainted with the entire range of Greek philosophical traditions through the original texts. If there are gaps in his knowledge, they are rather in his Jewish tradition as evidenced by his relying on the Greek translation of the Hebrew Bible. In his attempt to reconcile the Greek way of thinking with his Hebrew tradition he had antecedents such as Pseudo-Aristeas and Aristobulus.

Philo's works are divided into three categories:

1. The first group comprises writings that paraphrase the biblical texts of Moses: On Abraham, On the Decalogue, On Joseph, The Life of Moses, On the Creation of the World, On Rewards and Punishments, On the Special Laws, On the Virtues. A series of works include allegorical explanations of Genesis 2-41: On Husbandry, On the Cherubim, On the Confusion of Tongues, On the Preliminary Studies, The Worse Attacks the Better, On Drunkenness, On Flight and Finding, On the Giants, Allegorical Interpretation (Allegory of the Law), On the Migration of Abraham, On the Change of Names, On Noah's Work as a Planter, On the Posterity and Exile of Cain, Who is the Heir, On the Unchangeableness of God, On the Sacrifices of Abel and Cain, On Sobriety, On Dreams. Here belong also: Questions and Answers on Genesis and Questions and Answers on Exodus (aside from fragments preserved only in Armenian).

2. A series of works classified as philosophical treatises: Every Good Man is Free (a sequel of which had the theme that every bad man is a slave, which did not survive); On the Eternity of the World; On Providence (except for lengthy fragments preserved in Armenian); Alexander or On Whether Brute Animals Possess Reason (preserved only in Armenian) and called in Latin De Animalibus (On the Animals); a brief fragment De Deo (On God), preserved only in Armenian is an exegesis of Genesis 18, and belongs to the Allegory of the Law.

3. The third group includes historical-apologetic writings: Hypothetica or Apologia Pro Judaeos which survives only in two Greek extracts quoted by Eusebius. The first extract is a rationalistic version of Exodus giving a eulogic account of Moses and a summary of Mosaic constitution contrasting its severity with the laxity of the gentile laws; the second extract describes the Essenes. The other apologetic essays include Against Flaccus, The Embassy to Gaius, and On the Contemplative Life. But all these works are related to Philo's explanations of the texts of Moses.

3. Technique of Exposition

Philo uses an allegorical technique for interpretation of the Hebrew myth and in this he follows the Greek tradition of Theagenes of Rhegium (second half of the sixth century B.C.E.). Theagenes used this approach in defense of Homer's theology against the detractors. He said that the myths of gods struggling with each other referred to the opposition between the elements; the names of gods were made to refer to various dispositions of the soul, e.g., Athena was reflection, Aphrodite, desire, Hermes, elocution. Anaxagoras, too, explained the Homeric poems as discussions of virtue and justice. The Sophist Prodicus of Ceos (b. 470 B.C.E.), contemporary of Socrates, interpreted the gods of Homeric stories as personifications of those natural substances that are useful to human life [e.g., bread and Demeter, wine and Dionysus, water and Poseidon, fire and Hephaestus].  He also employed ethical allegory. His treatise, The Seasons, contains a Parable of Heracles, paraphrased in Xenophon's Memorabilia (2.1.21-34), which tells the story of Heracles who, at crossroad, was attracted by Virtue and Vice in the form of two women of great stature (Sacr. 20-44). The allegory was used by the cynic Antisthenes (contemporary of Plato) and Diogenes the Cynic.  Stoics expanded the Cynics' use of Homeric allegory in the interest of their philosophical system. Using this allegorical method, Philo seeks out the hidden message beneath the surface of any particular text and tries to read back a new doctrine into the work of the past. In a similar way Plutarch allegorized the ancient Egyptian mythology giving it a new meaning. But in some aspects of Jewish life Philo defends the literal interpretation of his tradition as in the debate on circumcision or the Sabbath (Mig. 89-93; Spec. leg. 1.1-11). Though he acknowledges the symbolic meaning of these rituals, he insists on their literal interpretation.

4. Emphasis on Contemplative Life and Philosophy

The key emphasis in Philo's philosophy is contrasting the spiritual life, understood as intellectual contemplation, with the mundane preoccupation with earthly concerns, either as an active life or as a search for pleasure. Philo disdained the material world and physical body (Spec. leg. 3.1-6). The body was for Philo as for Plato,  "an evil and a dead thing" (LA 3.72-74; Gig. 15), wicked by nature and a plotter against the soul (LA 3.69). But it was a necessary evil, hence Philo does not advocate a complete abnegation from life. On the contrary he advocates fulfilling first the practical obligations toward men and the use of mundane possessions for the accomplishment of praiseworthy works (Fug. 23-28; Plant. 167-168). Similarly he considers pleasure indispensable and wealth useful, but for a virtuous man they are not a perfect good (LA 3.69-72). He believed that men should steer themselves away from the physical aspect of things gradually. Some people, like philosophers, may succeed in focusing their minds on the eternal realities. Philo believed that man's final goal and ultimate bliss is in the "knowledge of the true and living God" (Decal. 81; Abr. 58; Praem. 14); "such knowledge is the boundary of happiness and blessedness" (Det. 86). To him, mystic vision allows our soul to see the Divine Logos (Ebr. 152) and achieve a union with God (Deut. 30:19-20; Post. 12). In a desire to validate the scripture as an inspired writing, he often compares it to prophetic ecstasy (Her. 69-70). His praise of the contemplative life of the monastic Therapeutae in Alexandria attests to his preference of bios theoreticos over bios practicos. He adheres to the Platonic picture of the souls descending into the material realm and that only the souls of philosophers are able to come to the surface and return to their realm in heaven (Gig. 12-15). Philo adopted the Platonic concept of the soul with its tripartite division. The rational part of the soul, however, is breathed into man as a part of God's substance. Philo speaks figuratively  "Now, when we are alive, we are so though our soul is dead and buried in our body, as if in a tomb. But if it were to die, then our soul would live according to its proper life being released from the evil and dead body to which it is bound" (Op. 67-69; LA 1.108).

5. Philosophy and Wisdom: a Path to Ethical Life

Philo differentiated between philosophy and wisdom.  To him philosophy is "the greatest good thing to men" (Op. 53-54), which they acquired because of a gift of reason from God (Op. 77). It is a devotion to wisdom, and a way to acquire the highest knowledge, "an attentive study of wisdom." Wisdom in turn is "the knowledge of all divine and human things, and of the respective causes of them" that is, according to Philo, contained in the Torah (Congr. 79). Hence it follows that Moses, as the author of the Torah, "had reached the very summit of philosophy" and "had learnt from the oracles of God the most numerous and important of the principles of nature" (Op. 8). Moses was also the interpreter of nature (Her. 213). By saying this Philo wanted to indicate that human wisdom has two origins: one is divine, the other is natural (Her. 182). Moreover, that Mosaic Law is not inconsistent with nature. A single law, the Logos of nature governs the entire world (Jos. 28-31) and its law is imprinted on the human mind (Prob. 46-47). Because of this we have a conscience that affects even wicked persons (QG 4.62). Wisdom is a consummated philosophy and as such has to be in agreement with the principles of nature (Mos. 2.48; Abr. 16; Op. 143; Spec. leg. 2.13; 3.46-47, 112, 137; Virt. 18). The study of philosophy has as its end "life in accordance with nature" and following the "path of right reason" (Mig. 128). Philosophy prepares us to a moral life, i.e., "to live in conformity with nature" (Prob. 160). From this follows that life in accordance with nature hastens us towards virtues (Mos. 2. 181; Abr. 60, Spec. leg. 1.155), and an unjust man is the one "who transgresses the ordinances of nature" (Spec. leg. 4.204; Cf. Decal. 132; Virt. 131-132; Plant. 49; Ebr. 142; Agr. 66). Thus Philo does not discount human reason, but contrasts only the true doctrine which is trust in God with uncertain, plausible, and unreliable reasoning (LA 3.228-229).

6. Philo's Ethical Doctrine

Philo's ethical doctrine is Stoic in its essence and includes the active effort to achieve virtue, the model of a sage to be followed, and practical advice concerning the achievement of the proper right reason and a proper emotional state of rational emotions (eupatheia). To Philo man is basically passive and it is God who sows noble qualities in the soul, thus we are instruments of God (LA 2.31-32; Cher. 127-128). Still man is the only creature endowed with freedom to act though his freedom is limited by the constitution of his mind. As such he is responsible for his action and "very properly receives blame for the offences which he designedly commits." This is so because he received a faculty of voluntary motion and is free from the dominion of necessity (Deus 47-48). Philo advocates the practice of virtue in both the divine and the human spheres. Lovers only of God and lovers only of men are both incomplete in virtue. Philo advocates a middle harmonious way (Decal. 106-110; Spec. leg. 4. 102). He differentiates four virtues: wisdom, self-control, courage, and justice (LA 1.63-64). Human dispositions Philo divides into three groups – the best is given the vision of God, the next has a vision on the right i.e., the Beneficent or Creative Power whose name is God, and the third has a vision on the left, i.e., the Ruling Power called Lord (Abr. 119-130). Felicity is achieved in the culmination of three values: the spiritual, the corporeal, and the external (QG 3.16). Philo adopts the Stoic wise man as a model for human behavior. Such a wise man should imitate God who was impassible (apathes) hence the sage should achieve a state of apatheia, i.e., he should be free of irrational emotions (passions), pleasure, desire, sorrow, and fear, and should replace them by rational or well-reasoned emotions (eupatheia), joy, will, compunction, and caution. In such a state of eupatheia, the sage achieves a serene, stable, and joyful disposition in which he is directed by reason in his decisions (QG 2.57; Abr. 201-204; Fug. 166-167; Mig. 67). But at the same time Philo claims that the needs of the body should not be neglected and rejects the other extreme, i.e., the practice of austerities. Everything should be governed by reason, self-control, and moderation. Joy and pleasure do not have intrinsic values, but are by-products of virtue and characterize the sage (Fug. 25-34; Det. 124-125; LA 80).

7. Philo's Mysticism and Transcendence of God

Mysticism is a doctrine that maintains that one can gain knowledge of reality that is not accessible to sense perception or to reason. It is usually associated with some mental and physical training and in the theistic version it involves a sensation of closeness to or unity with God experienced as temporal and spatial transcendence. According to Philo, man's highest union with God is limited to God's manifestation as the Logos. It is similar to a later doctrine of intellectual contact of our human intellect with the transcendent intellect developed by Alexander of Aphrodisias and Ibn Rushd and different from the Plotinian doctrine of the absorption into the ineffable one. The notion of the utter transcendence of the First Principle probably goes back as far as Anaximander who postulated the Indefinite (apeiron) as this Principle (arche) and could be found in Plato's concept of the Good,  but the formulation is accredited to Speusippus, the successor of Plato in the Academy.  Philo's biblical tradition in which one could not name or describe God was the major factor in accepting the Greek Platonic concepts and emphasis on God's transcendence. But this position is rather alien to biblical and rabbinical understanding. In the Bible, God is represented in a "material" and "physical" way. Philosophically, however, Philo differentiated between the existence of God, which could be demonstrated, and the nature of God which humans are not able to cognize. God's essence is beyond any human experience or cognition, therefore it can be described only by stating what God is not (via negativa) or by depriving him of any attribute of sensible objects and putting God beyond any attribute applicable to a sensible world (via eminentiae) because God alone is a being whose existence is his essence (Det. 160). Philo states in many places that God's essence is one and single, that he does not belong to any class or that there is in God any distinction of genus and species. Therefore, we cannot say anything about his qualities "For God is not only devoid of peculiar qualities, but he is likewise not of the form of man" (LA 1.36); he "is free from distinctive qualities" (LA 1.51; 3.36; Deus 55). Strictly speaking, we cannot make any positive or negative statements about God: "Who can venture to affirm that ... he is a body, or that he is incorporeal, or that he has such and such distinctive qualities, or that he has no such qualities? ... But he alone can utter a positive assertion respecting himself, since he alone has an accurate knowledge of his own nature" (LA 3.206). Moreover, since the essence of God is single, therefore its property must be one which Philo denotes as acting "Now it is an especial attribute of God to create, and this faculty it is impious to ascribe to any created being" (Cher. 77). The expression of this act of God, which is at the same time his thinking, is his Logos (Prov. 1.7; Sacr. 65; Mos. 1.283). Though God is hidden, his reality is made manifest by the Logos that is God's image (Somn. 1.239; Conf. 147-148) and by the sensible universe, which in turn is the image of the Logos, that is "the archetypal model, the idea of ideas" (Op. 25). Because of this we can perceive God's existence, though we cannot fathom his essence. But there are degrees and levels to our cognizance of God. Those at the summit and the highest level may grasp the unity of the powers of God, at the lower level people recognize the Logos as the Regent Power, and those still at the lowest level, immersed in the sensible world are unable to perceive the intelligible reality (Fug. 94; Abr. 124-125). Steps in mystic experience involve a realization of human nothingness, a realization that the one who acts is God alone, and abandonment of our sense of perception (Her. 69-71; Plant. 64; Conf. 95; Ebr. 152). A mystic state will produce a sensation of tranquility, and stability; it appears suddenly and is described as a sober intoxication (Gig. 49; Sacr. 78; Somn. 1.71; Op. 70-71).

8. Source of Intuition of the Infinite Reality

According to Philo the highest knowledge man may have is the knowledge of infinite reality which is not accessible by the normal senses, but by unmediated intuition of divinity. Humans were endowed with the mind, i.e., ability to reason and the outward senses. We received the first in order that we might consider the things that are discernable only by the intellect, the end of which is truth, and the second for the perception of visible things the end of which is opinion. Opinions are unstable, based on probability, and untrustworthy. Thus by this divine gift men are able to come to a conclusion about the existence of the divinity. They can do it in two ways: one is the apprehension of God through contemplation of his creation and forming a "conjectural conception of the Creator by a probable train of reasoning"(Praem. 43). And in the process the soul may climb the ladder to perfection by using natural means i.e., natural dispositions, instruction, i.e., being educated to virtue, or by meditation. The other is a direct apprehension by being instructed by God himself when the mind elevates itself above the physical world and perceives the uncreated One through a clear vision (Praem. 28-30, 40-66; LA 97-103). This vision is accessible to the "purified mind" to which God appears as One. To the mind uninitiated in the mysteries, unable to apprehend God alone by himself, but only through his actions, God appears as a triad constituted by him and his two powers, Creative and Royal (Abr. 97-103). Such a direct vision of God is not dependent on revelation but is possible because we have an impression of God in our mind, which is nothing but a tiny fragment of the Logos pervading the whole universe, not separated from its source, but only extended (Det. 90; Gig. 27; LA 1.37; Mut. 223; Spec. leg. 4.123). And we receive this portion of the Divine Mind at birth being endowed with a mind which makes us resemble God (Op. 65-69). At birth two powers enter every soul, the salutary (Beneficent) and the destructive (Unbounded). The world is created through these same powers. The creation is accomplished when " the salutary and beneficent (power) brings to an end the unbounded and destructive nature." Similarly, one or the other power may prevail in humans, but when the salutary power "brings to an end the unbounded and destructive nature" humans achieve immortality. Thus both the world and humans are a mixture of these powers and the prevailing one has the moral determination: "For the souls of foolish men have the unbounded and destructive rather than the powerful and salutary [power], and it is full of misery when it dwells with earthly creatures. But the prudent and noble [soul] receives the powerful and salutary [power] and, on the contrary, possesses in itself good fortune and happiness" (QE 1.23). Philo evidently analyzes these two powers on two levels. One is the divine level in which the Unlimited or the Unbounded is a representation of God's infinite and immeasurable goodness and creativity. The Logos keeps it in balance through the Limit. The other level is the human one where the Unlimited or the Unbounded represents destruction and everything morally abhorrent. Human reason is able, however, to maintain in it some kind of balance. This mind, divine and immortal, is an additional and differentiating part of the human soul which animates man just like the souls of animals which are devoid of mind. The notion of God's existence is thus imprinted in our mind that needs only some illumination to have a direct vision of God (Abr. 79-80; Det. 86-87; LA 1.38). Thus we can arrive at it through the dialectical reasoning as apprehension of the First Principle. Philo differentiates two modes for perceiving God, an inferential mode and a direct mode without mediation: "As long, therefore, as our mind still shines around and hovers around, pouring as it were a noontide light into the whole soul, we, being masters of ourselves, are not possessed by any extraneous influence" (Her. 264). Thus this direct mode is not in any way a type of inspiration or inspired prophecy; it is unlike "inspiration" when a "trance" or a "heaven-inflicted madness" seizes us and divine light sets as it happens "to the race of prophets" (Her. 265).

9. Philo's Doctrine of Creation

Philo attempts to bridge the Greek "scientific" or rational philosophy with the strictly mythical ideology of the Hebrew scriptures. As a basis for the "scientific" approach he uses the worldview presented by Plato in Timaeus which remained influential in Hellenistic times. The characteristic feature of the Greek scientific approach is the biological interpretation of the physical world in anthropocentric terms, in terms of purpose and function that may apply to biological and psychological realities but may not be applied to the physical world. Moreover, Philo operates often on two levels: the level of mythical Hebraic religious tradition and the level of philosophical speculation in the Greek tradition. Nevertheless, Philo attempts to harmonize the Mosaic and Platonic accounts of the generation of the world by interpreting the biblical story using Greek scientific categories and concepts. He elaborates a religious-philosophical worldview that became the foundation for the future Christian doctrine. Philo's doctrine of creation is intertwined with his doctrine of God and it answers two crucial questions: 1. Was the world created ex nihilo or from primordial matter? 2. Was creation a temporal act or is it an eternal process?

a. Philo's Model of Creation

Though Philo's model of creation comes from Plato's Timaeus, the direct agent of creation is not God himself (described in Plato as Demiurge, Maker, Artificer), but the Logos. Philo believes that the Logos is "the man of God" (Conf. 41) or the shadow of God that was used as an instrument and a pattern of all creation (LA 3.96). The Logos converted unqualified, unshaped preexistent matter, which Philo describes as "destitute of arrangement, of quality, of animation, of distinctive character and full of disorder and confusion," (Op. 22) into four primordial elements:

For it is out of that essence that God created everything, without indeed touching it himself, for it was not lawful for the all-wise and all-blessed God to touch materials which were all misshapen and confused, but he created them by the agency of his incorporeal powers, of which the proper name is Ideas, which he so exerted that every genus received its proper form (LA 1.329).

According to Philo, Moses anticipated Plato by teaching that water, darkness, and chaos existed before the world came into being (Op. 22).  Moses, having reached the philosophy summit, recognized that there are two fundamental principles of being, one, "an active cause, the intellect of the universe." The other is passive, "inanimate and incapable of motion by any intrinsic power of its own" (Op. 8-9), matter, lifeless and motionless. But Philo is ambiguous in such statements as these: "God, who created all things, not only brought them all to light, but he has even created what before had no existence, not only being their maker, but also their founder" (Somn. 1.76; Op. 81); "God who created the whole universe out of things that had no previous existence..." (LA 3.10). It seems that Philo does not refer here to God's creation of the visible world ex nihilo but to his creation of the intelligible Forms prior to the formation of the sensible world (Spec. leg. 1.328). Philo reasons that by analogy to the biblical version of the creation of man in the image of God, so the visible world as such must have been created in the image of its archetype present in the mind of God. "It is manifest also, that that archetypal seal, which we call that world which is perceptible only to the intellect, must itself be the archetypal model, the Idea of Ideas, the Logos of God" (Op. 25). In his doctrine of God Philo interprets the Logos, which is the Divine Mind as the Form of Forms (Platonic), the Idea of Ideas or the sum total of Forms or Ideas (Det. 75-76). The Logos is an indestructible Form of wisdom. Interpreting the garment of the high priest (Exod. 28:34; 36) Philo states: "But the seal is an Idea of Ideas, according to which God fashioned the world, being an incorporeal Idea, comprehensible only by the intellect" (Mig. 103). The invisible intelligible world which was used by the Logos as a model for creation or rather formation of the visible world from the (preexisting) unformed matter was created in the mind of God: "The incorporeal world then was already completed, having its seat in the Divine Logos and the world, perceptible by the external senses, was made on the model of it" (Op. 36). Describing Moses' account of the creation of man, Philo states also that Moses calls the invisible Divine Logos the Image of God (Op. 24; 31; LA 1.9). Forms, though inapprehensible in essence, leave an impress and a copy and procure qualities and shapes to shapeless things and unorganized matter. Mind can grasp the Forms by longing for wisdom. "The desire for wisdom alone is continual and incessant, and it fills all its pupils and disciples with famous and most beautiful doctrines" (Spec. leg. 1-45-50). Creation thus took place from preexistent shapeless matter (Plato's Receptacle) which is "the nurse of all becoming and change"  and for this creation God used the Forms which are his powers (Spec. leg. 1.327-329). This may seem a controversial point whether the primordial matter was preexistent or was created ex nihilo. Philo's view is not clearly stated and there are seemingly contradictory statements. In some places Philo states, "for as nothing is generated out of nothing, so neither can anything which exists be destroyed as to become non-existence" (Aet. 5-6). The same is repeated in his De Specialibus legibus: "Being made of us [i.e. elements] when you were born, you will again be dissolved into us when you come to die; for it is not the nature of any thing to be destroyed so as to become nonexistent, but the end brings it back to those elements from which its beginnings come" (Spec. 1.266). The resolution of this seeming controversy is to be found in Philo's theory of eternal creation, which is described next in connection with the Logos as the agent of creation. Philo, being a strict monist, could not accept the existence of independent and eternal preexistent matter (however disorganized and chaotic) as Plato did.

b. Eternal Creation

Philo denies the Aristotelian conclusion coming, according to him, from the superficial observation that the world existed from eternity, independent of any creative act. "For some men, admiring the world itself rather than the Creator of the world, have represented it as existing without any maker, and eternal, and as impiously and falsely have represented God as existing in a state of complete inactivity" (Op. 7). He elaborates instead his theory of the eternal creation (Prov. 1.6-9), as did Proclus (410-485 C.E.) much later in interpreting Plato.  Proclus brilliantly demonstrated that even in the theistic system the world though generated must be eternal, because the "world is always fabricated ... is always becoming to be."  Proclus believed, as did Philo, that the corporeal world is always coming into existence but never possesses real being. Thus God, according to Philo, did not begin to create the world at a certain moment, but he is "eternally applying himself to its creation" (Prov. 1.7; Op. 7; Aet. 83-84).

But God is the creator of time also, for he is the father of his father, and the father of time is the world, which made its own mother the creation of time, so that time stands towards God in the relation of a grandson; for this world is a younger son of God, inasmuch as it is perceptible by the outward sense, for the only son he speaks of as older than the world, is Idea, and this is not perceptible by the intellect, but having thought the other worthy of the rights of primogeniture, he has decided that it should remain with him; therefore, this younger son, perceptible by the external senses being set in motion, has caused the nature of time to shine forth, and to become conspicuous, so that there is nothing future to God, who has the very boundaries of time subject to him; for their life is not time, but the beautiful model of eternity; and in eternity nothing is past and nothing is future, but everything is present only (Deus. 31-32).

Philo contends that God thinks simultaneously with his acting or creating. "For God while he spake the word, did at the same moment create; nor did he allow anything to come between the Logos and the deed; and if one may advance a doctrine which is pretty nearly true, His Logos is his deed" (Sacr. 65; Mos.1.283). Thus any description of creation in temporal terms, e.g., by Moses, is not to be taken literally, but rather is an accommodation to the biblical language (Op. 19; Mut. 27; LA 2.9-13):

God is continuously ordering matter by his thought. His thinking was not anterior to his creating and there never was a time when he did not create, the Ideas themselves having been with him from the beginning. For God's will is not posterior to him, but is always with him, for natural motions never give out. Thus ever thinking he creates, and furnishes to sensible things the principle of their existence, so that both should exist together: the ever-creating Divine Mind and the sense-perceptible things to which beginning of being is given (Prov. 1.7).

Thus Philo postulates a crucial modification to the Platonic doctrine of the Forms, namely that God himself eternally creates the intelligible world of Ideas as his thoughts. The intelligible Forms are thus the principle of existence to the sensible things which are given through them their existence. This simply means in mystical terms that nothing exists or acts except God. On this ideal model God then orders and shapes the formless matter through the agency of his Logos (Her. 134, 140) into the objects of the sensible world:

Now we must form a somewhat similar opinion of God [Philo makes an analogy to a plan of the city in the mind of its builder], who, having determined to found a mighty state, first of all conceived its form in his mind, according to which form he made a world perceptible only by the intellect, and then completed one visible to the external senses, using the first one as a model (Op. 19).

Philo claims a scriptural support for these metaphysics saying that the creation of the world was after the pattern of an intelligible world (Gen. 1:17) which served as its model. During the first day God created Ideas or Forms of heaven, earth, air (= darkness), empty space  (= abyss), water, pneuma (= mind), light, the intelligible pattern of the sun and the stars (Op. 29). There are, however, differences between Philo and Plato: according to Plato, there is no Form of space (chora). In Plato space is not apprehended by reason; rather it had its own special status in the world. Also pneuma as a Form of soul does not exist in the system of Plato. Plato designates this primordial unorganized state of matter a self-existing Receptacle; it is most stable and a permanent constituent: "It must be called always the same, for it never departs at all from its own character" (Plato, Timaeus 50b-c). Philo, being a strict monist could not allow even for a self-existing void so he makes its pattern an eternal idea in the divine mind. Before Philo there was no explicit theory of creation ex nihilo ever postulated in Jewish or Greek traditions. Both Philo and Plato do not explain how the reflections (eidola) of Forms are made in the world of senses. They do not attribute them to God or the Demiurge because it would be contrary to their conception of God as "good" and "desiring that all things should come as near as possible to being like himself."  God could not create the copies of the Forms which should be "disordered." It seems then that the primordial unorganized matter was spontaneously produced on the pattern of the Ideas. The Logos would shape the elements from this preexistent matter, first into heavy (or dense) and light (or rare) elements which were differentiated properly into water and earth, and air and fire (Her. 134-140; 143). As in Plato certain geometrical descriptions characterize Philo's elements. Fire was characterized by a pyramid, air by an octahedron, water by an icosahedron, and earth by a cube (QG 3.49). In Plato's theory too, one can envision a sort of automatic reflection of the Forms in the Receptacle due to the properties of Forms. God could not, according to Philo's philosophy, create the preexistent matter. "And what God praised was not the materials which he had worked up in creation, destitute of life and melody, and easily dissolved, and moreover in their own intrinsic nature perishable, and out of proportion and full of iniquity, but rather his own skillful work, completed according to one equal and well-proportioned power and knowledge always alike and identical." (Her. 160). Logically, God is for Philo indirectly the source of preexistent matter but Philo does not ascribe to God even the shaping of matter directly. In fact this unorganized matter never existed because it was simultaneously ordered into organized matter – the four elements from which the world is made.

10. Doctrine of Miracles: Naturalism and Comprehension

Closely connected with Philo's doctrine of creation is his doctrine of miracles. His favorite statement is that "everything is possible with God." This, however, does not mean that God can act outside the natural order of things or his own nature. Thus Philo emphasizes that God's miraculous works are within the realm of the natural order. Doing this he extends the natural order to encompass the biblical miracles and tries to explain them by their coincidence with natural events. For example, the miracle at the Red Sea which he characterizes as a "mighty work of nature" (Mos. 1.165), or the plague of darkness as a total eclipse (Mos. 1.123), or the story of Balaam as an allegorical one (Cher. 32-35). This was the tendency inherited from some Stoics who attempted to explain miracles of divination as events preordered in nature by the divine power pervading it. Similarly Philo considers the biblical miracles as a part of the eternal pattern of the Logos acting in nature. Augustine considers miracles as implanted in the destiny of the cosmos since the time of its creation.  Philo and rabbinic literature emphasize the miraculous and marvelous character of nature itself. All natural things are wonderful, but are "despised by us by reason of our familiarity with them" and all things with which we are unaccustomed, make an impression on us "for the love of novelty"(Mos. 1.2-213). Even in modern Jewish teaching there is a tendency to explain the miraculous by the natural. Thus the one can find a certain discrepancy in Philo's writing: on one hand Philo is rationalist and naturalist in the spirit of Greek philosophical tradition, on the other, he follows popular religion to preserve the biblical tradition. Philo emphasizes, however, that we are limited in our human capabilities to "comprehend everything" about the physical world, and it is better to "suspend our judgment" than to err:

But since we are found to be influenced in different manners by the same things at different times, we should have nothing positive to assert about anything, inasmuch as what appears has no settled or stationary existence, but is subject to various, and multiform, and ever-recurring changes. For it follows of necessity, since the imagination is unstable, that judgment formed by it must be unstable; and there are many reasons for this (Ebr. 170).

But we are able to comprehend things by comparing them with their opposites and thus arriving at their true nature. The same applies to what is virtue and to what is vice, and to what is just and good and to what is unjust and bad.

And, indeed, if any one considers everything that is in the world, he will be able to arrive at a proper estimate of its character, by taking it in the same manner; for each separate thing is by itself incomprehensible, but by a comparison with another thing, is easy to understand (Ebr. 187).

The same reasoning he extends to differences between national customs and ancient laws which vary according to countries, nations, cities, different villages, even private houses and instruction received by people from childhood.

And since this is the case, who is foolish enough and ridiculous as to affirm positively that such and such a thing is just, or wise, or honorable, or expedient? For whatever this man defines as such, some one else, who from his childhood has learnt a contrary lesson, will be sure to deny (Ebr. 197).

11. Doctrine of the Logos in Philo's Writings

The pivotal and the most developed doctrine in Philo's writings on which hinges his entire philosophical system, is his doctrine of the Logos. By developing this doctrine he fused Greek philosophical concepts with Hebrew religious thought and provided the foundation for Christianity, first in the development of the Christian Pauline myth and speculations of John, later in the Hellenistic Christian Logos and Gnostic doctrines of the second century. All other doctrines of Philo hinge on his interpretation of divine existence and action. The term Logos was widely used in the Greco-Roman culture and in Judaism. Through most schools of Greek philosophy, this term was used to designate a rational, intelligent and thus vivifying principle of the universe. This principle was deduced from an understanding of the universe as a living reality and by comparing it to a living creature. Ancient people did not have the dynamic concept of "function," therefore, every phenomenon had to have an underlying factor, agent, or principle responsible for its occurrence. In the Septuagint version of the Old Testament the term logos (Hebrew davar) was used frequently to describe God's utterances (Gen. 1:3, 6,9; 3:9,11; Ps. 32:9), God's action (Zech. 5:1-4; Ps. 106:20; Ps. 147:15), and messages of prophets by means of which God communicated his will to his people (Jer. 1:4-19, 2:1-7; Ezek. 1:3; Amos 3:1). Logos is used here only as a figure of speech designating God's activity or action. In the so-called Jewish wisdom literature we find the concept of Wisdom (hokhmah and sophia) which could be to some degree interpreted as a separate personification or individualization (hypostatization), but it is contrasted often with human stupidity. In the Hebrew culture it was a part of the metaphorical and poetic language describing divine wisdom as God's attribute and it clearly refers to a human characteristic in the context of human earthly existence. The Greek, metaphysical concept of the Logos is in sharp contrast to the concept of a personal God described in anthropomorphic terms typical of Hebrew thought. Philo made a synthesis of the two systems and attempted to explain Hebrew thought in terms of Greek philosophy by introducing the Stoic concept of the Logos into Judaism. In the process the Logos became transformed from a metaphysical entity into an extension of a divine and transcendental anthropomorphic being and mediator between God and men. Philo offered various descriptions of the Logos.

a. The Utterance of God

Following the Jewish mythical tradition, Philo represents the Logos as the utterance of God found in the Jewish scripture of the Old Testament since God's words do not differ from his actions (Sacr. 8; Somn. 1.182; Op. 13).

b. The Divine Mind

Philo accepts the Platonic intelligible Forms. Forms exist forever though the impressions they make may perish with the substance on which they were made (Det. 75-77; Mut. 80, 122. 146; Cher. 51). They are not, however, beings existing separately, only exist in the mind of God as his thoughts and powers. Philo explicitly identifies Forms with God's powers. Those powers are his glory, though invisible and sensed only by the purest intellect. "And though they are by nature inapprehensible in their essence, still they show a kind of impression or copy of their energy and operation"(Spec. leg. 1.45-50). In his doctrine of God Philo interprets the Logos, which is the Divine Mind, as the Form of Forms (Platonic), the Idea of Ideas or the sum total of Forms or Ideas. Logos is the indestructible Form of wisdom comprehensible only by the intellect (Det. 75-76; Mig. 103).

c. God's Transcendent Power

The Logos which God begat eternally because it is a manifestation of God's thinking-acting (Prov. 1.7; Sacr. 65; Mos. 1.283), is an agent that unites two powers of the transcendent God. Philo relates that in an inspiration his own soul told him:

...that in the one living and true God there were two supreme and primary powers, Goodness [or Creative Power] and Authority [or Regent Power]; and that by his Goodness he had created every thing; and that by his Authority he governed all that he had created; and that the third thing which was between the two, and had the effect of bringing them together was the Logos, for it was owing to the Logos that God was both a ruler and good (Cher. 1.27-28).

And further, Philo finds in the Bible indications of the operation of the Logos, e.g., the biblical cherubim are the symbols of the two powers of God but the flaming sword (Gen. 3.24) is the symbol of the Logos conceived before all things and before all manifest (Cher. 1.27-28; Sacr. 59; Abr. 124-125; Her. 166; QE 2.68). Philo's description of the Logos (the Mind of God) corresponds to the Greek concept of mind as hot and fiery. Philo obviously refers in these powers to the Unlimited (apeiron) and the Limited (peras) of Plato's Philebus and earlier Pythagorean tradition, and they will later reappear in Plotinus as Nous. In Plato these two principles or powers operate at the metaphysical, cosmic (cosmic soul) and human (human soul) levels. Philo considers these powers to be inherent in transcendental God, and that God himself may be thought of as multiplicity in unity. The Beneficent (Creative) and Regent (Authoritative) Powers are called God and Lord, respectively. Goodness is Boundless Power, Creative, and God. The Regent Power is also Punitive Power and Lord (Her. 166). Creative Power, moreover, permeates the world, the power by which God made and ordered all things. Philo follows the ideas of the Stoics that nous pervades every part of the universe as it does the soul in us. Therefore, Philo asserts that the aspect of God which transcends his powers (which we have to understand to be the Logos) cannot be conceived of in terms of place but as pure being, "but that power of his by which he made and ordered all things called God, in accordance with the etymology of that name, enfolds the whole and passes through the parts of the universe" (Conf. 136-137). According to Philo, the two powers of God are separated by God himself who is standing above in the midst of them (Her. 166). Referring to Genesis 18: 2 Philo claims that God and his two Powers are in reality one. To the human mind they appear as a Triad, with God above the powers that belong to him: "For this cannot be so keen of spirit that, it can see Him who is above the powers that belong to Him, (namely) God, distinct from everything else. For so soon as one sets eyes on God, there also appear together with His being, the ministering powers, so that in place of one he makes the appearance of a triad (QG 4.2)." In addition to these two main powers, there are other powers of the Father and his Logos, including merciful and legislative (Fug. 94-95).

d. First-born Son of God

The Logos has an origin, but as God's thought it also has eternal generation. It exists as such before everything else all of which are secondary products of God's thought and therefore it is called the "first-born." The Logos is thus more than a quality, power, or characteristic of God; it is an entity eternally generated as an extension, to which Philo ascribes many names and functions. The Logos is the first-begotten Son of the Uncreated Father: "For the Father of the universe has caused him to spring up as the eldest son, whom, in another passage, he [Moses] calls the first-born; and he who is thus born, imitating the ways of his father, has formed such and such species, looking to his archetypal patterns" (Conf. 63). This picture is somewhat confusing because we learn that in the final analysis the Creative Power is also identified with the Logos. The Creative Power is logically prior to the Regent Power since it is conceptually older. Though the powers are of equal age, the creative is prior because one is king not of the nonexistent but of what has already come into being (QE 2.62).  These two powers thus delimit the bounds of heaven and the world. The Creative Power is concerned that things that come into being through it should not be dissolved, and the Regent Power that nothing either exceeds or is robbed of its due, all being arbitrated by the laws of equality through which things continue eternally (QE 2.64). The positive properties of God may be subdivided into these two polar forces; therefore, the expression of the One is the Logos that constitutes the manifestation of God's thinking, acting (Prov. 1.7; Sacr. 65; Mos. 1.283). According to Philo these powers of the Logos can be grasped at various levels. Those who are at the summit level grasp them as constituting an indivisible unity. At the two lower levels, respectively, are those who know the Logos as the Creative Power and beneath them those who know it as the Regent Power (Fug. 94-95; Abr. 124-125). The next level down represents those limited to the sensible world, unable to perceive the intelligible realities (Gig. 20). At each successively lower level of divine knowledge the image of God's essence is increasingly more obscured. These two powers will appear again in Plotinus. Here Undefined or Unlimited Intelligible Matter proceeds from the One and then turns back to its source (Enneads 2.4.5; 5.4.2; 6.7.17)

e. Universal Bond: in the Physical World and in the Human Soul

The Logos is the bond holding together all the parts of the world. And as a part of the human soul it holds the body together and permits its operation. In the mind of a wise man thoroughly purified, it allows preservation of virtues in an unimpaired condition (Fug. 112). "And the Logos, which connects together and fastens every thing, is peculiarly full itself of itself, having no need whatever of any thing beyond" (Her. 188).

f. Immanent Reason

The reasoning capacity of a human mind is but a portion of the all-pervading Divine Logos. Mind is a special gift to humans from God and it has divine essence, therefore, as such, it is imperishable. By receiving this humans received freedom and the power of spontaneous will free from necessity (Deus. 47). Philo emphasizes that man "has received this one extraordinary gift, intellect, which is accustomed to comprehend the nature of all bodies and of all things at the same time." Thus humanity resembles God in the sense of having free volition for unlike plants and other animals, the soul of man received from God the power of voluntary motion and in this respect resembles God (Deus. 48). This concept, that it is chiefly in the intellect and free volition that makes humans differ from other life forms, has a long history which can be traced to Anaxagoras and Aristotle.  Philo calls "men of God" those people who made God-inspired intellectual life their dominant issue. Such men "have entirely transcended the sensible sphere, and migrated to the intelligible world, and dwell there enrolled as citizens of the Commonwealth of Ideas, which are imperishable, and incorporeal ... those who are born of God are priests and prophets who have not thought fit to mix themselves up in the constitutions of this world...."(Gig. 61). Philo writes in reference to the Old Testament expression that God "breathed into" (equivalent of "inspired" or "gave life to") inanimate things that through this act God extended his spirit into humans (LA 1.37). Though his spirit is distributed among men it is not diminished (Gig. 27). The nature of the reasoning power in men is indivisible from the Divine Logos, but "though they are indivisible themselves, they divide an innumerable multitude of other things." Just as the Divine Logos divided and distributed everything in nature (that is, it gave qualities to undifferentiated, primordial matter), so the human mind by exertion of its intellect is able to divide everything and everybody into an infinite number of parts. And this is possible because it resembles the Logos of the Creator and Father of the universe: "So that, very naturally, the two things which thus resemble each other, both the mind which is in us and that which is above us, being without parts and invisible, will still be able in a powerful manner to divide and distribute [comprehend] all existing things" (Her. 234-236; Det. 90). Uninitiated minds are unable to apprehend the Existent by itself; they only perceive it through its actions. To them God appears as a Triad -- himself and his two Powers: Creative and Ruling. To the "purified soul," however, God appears as One.

When, therefore, the soul is shone upon by God as if at noonday, and when it is wholly and entirely filled with that light which is appreciable only by the intellect, and by being wholly surrounded with its brilliancy is free from all shackle or darkness, it then perceives a threefold image of one subject, one image of the living God, and others of the other two, as if they were shadows irradiated by it .... but he claims that the term shadow is just a more vivid representation of the matter intended to be intimated. Since this is not the actual truth, but in order that one may when speaking keep as close to the truth as possible, the one in the middle is the Father of the universe, who in the sacred scripture is called by his proper name, I am that I am; and the beings on each side are those most ancient powers which are always close to the living God, one of which is called his Creative Power, and the other his Royal Power. And the Creative Power is God, for it is by this that he made and arranged the universe; and the Royal Power is the Lord, for it is fitting that the Creator should lord it over and govern the creature. Therefore, the middle person of the three, being attended by each of his powers as by body-guard, presents to the mind, which is endowed with the faculty of sight, a vision at one time of one being, and at another time of three; of one when the soul being completely purified, and having surmounted not only the multitude of numbers, but also the number two, which is the neighbour of the unit, hastens onward to that idea which is devoid of mixture, free from all combination, and by itself in need of nothing else whatever; and of three, when, not being as yet made perfect as to the important virtues, it is still seeking for initiation in those of less consequence, and is not able to attain to a comprehension of the living God by its own unassisted faculties without the aid of something else, but can only do so by judging of his deeds, whether as creator or as governor. This then, as they say, is the second best thing; and it no less partakes in the opinion which is dear to and devoted to God. But the first-mentioned disposition has no such share, but is itself the very God-loving and God-beloved opinion itself, or rather it is truth which is older than opinion, and more valuable than any seeming (Abr. 119-123).

The one category of enlightened people is able to comprehend God through a vision beyond the physical universe. It is as though they advanced on a heavenly ladder and conjectured the existence of God through an inference (Praem. 40). The other category apprehends him through himself, as light is seen by light. For God gave man such a perception "as should prove to him that God exists, and not to show him what God is." Philo believes that even the existence of God "cannot possibly be contemplated by any other being; because, in fact, it is not possible for God to be comprehended by any being but himself " (Praem. 39-40). Philo adds, "Only men who have raised themselves upward from below, so as, through the contemplation of his works, to form a conjectural conception of the Creator by a probable train of reasoning" (Praem. 43) are holy, and are his servants. Next Philo explains how such men have an impression of God's existence as revealed by God himself, by the similitude of the sun (Mut. 4-6) a concept which he borrowed from Plato.  As light is seen in consequence of its own presence so, "In the same manner God, being his own light, is perceived by himself alone, nothing and no other being co-operating with or assisting him, a being at all able to contribute to pure comprehension of his existence; But these men have arrived at the real truth, who form their ideas of God from God, of light from light" (Praem. 45-46). As Plato and Philo had done, Plotinus later used this image of the sun. Thus the Logos, eternally created (begotten), is an expression of the immanent powers of God, and at the same time, it emanates into everything in the world.

g. Immanent Mediator of the Physical Universe

In certain places in his writings Philo accepts the Stoic theory of the immanent Logos as the power or Law binding the opposites in the universe and mediating between them, and directing the world. For example, Philo envisions that the world is suspended in a vacuum and asks, how is it that the world does not fall down since it is not held by any solid thing. Philo then gives the answer that the Logos extending himself from the center to its bounds and from its extremities to the center again, runs nature's course joining and binding fast all its parts. Likewise the Logos prevents the earth from being dissolved by all the water contained within. The Logos produces a harmony (a favorite expression of the Stoics) between various parts of the universe (Plant. 8-10). Thus Philo sees God as only indirectly the Creator of the world: God is the author of the invisible, intelligible world which served as a model for the Logos. Philo says Moses called this archetypal heavenly power by various names: "the beginning, the image, and the sight of God"(LA 1.43). Following the views of Plato and the Stoics, Philo believed that in all existing things there must be an active cause, and a passive subject; and that the active cause Philo designates as the Logos. He gives the impression that he believed that the Logos functions like the Platonic "Soul of the World" (Aet. 84).

h. The Angel of the Lord, Revealer of God

Philo describes the Logos as the revealer of God symbolized in the Scripture (Gen. 31:13; 16:8; etc) by an angel of the Lord (Somn. 1.228-239; Cher. 1-3). The Logos is the first-born and the eldest and chief of the angels.

i. Multi-Named Archetype

Philo's Logos has many names (Conf. 146).  Philo identifies his Logos with Wisdom of Proverbs 8:22 (Ebr. 31). Moreover, Moses, according to Philo called this Wisdom "Beginning," "Image," "Sight of God." And his personal wisdom is an imitation of the archetypal Divine Wisdom. All terrestrial wisdom and virtue are but copies and representations of the heavenly Logos (LA 1.43, 45-46).

j. Soul-Nourishing Manna and Wisdom

God sends "the stream" from his Wisdom which irrigates God-loving souls; consequently they become filled with "manna." Manna is described by Philo as a "generic thing" coming from God. It does not come from God directly, however: "the most generic is God, and next is the Logos of God, the other things subsist in word (Logos) only" (LA 2.86). According to Philo, Moses called manna "the most ancient Logos of God (Det. 118)." Next Philo explains that men are "nourished by the whole word (Logos) of God, and by every portion of it ... Accordingly, the soul of the more perfect man is nourished by the whole word (Logos); but we must be contented if we are nourished by a portion of it" (LA 3.175-176). And "the Wisdom of God, which is the nurse and foster-mother and educator of those who desire incorruptible food ... immediately supplies food to those which are brought forth by her ... but the fountain of divine wisdom is borne along, at one time in a more gentle and moderate stream, and at another with greater rapidity and a more exceeding violence and impetuosity....(Det. 115-117). This Wisdom as the Daughter of God "has obtained a nature intact and undefiled both because of her own propriety and the dignity of him who begot her." Having identified the Logos with Wisdom, Philo runs into a grammatical problem: in the Greek language "wisdom" (sophia) is feminine and "word" (logos) is masculine; moreover, Philo saw Wisdom's function as masculine. So he explains that Wisdom's name is feminine, but her nature is masculine:

Indeed all the virtues have women's designations, but powers and activities of truly perfect men. For that which comes after God, even if it were the most venerable of all other things, holds second place, and was called feminine in contrast to the Creator of the universe, who is masculine, and in accordance with its resemblance to everything else. For the feminine always falls short and is inferior to the masculine, which has priority. Let us then pay no attention to the discrepancy in the terms, and say that the daughter of God, Wisdom, is both masculine and the father, inseminating and engendering in souls a desire to learn discipline, knowledge, practical insight, notable and laudable actions (Fug. 50-52).

k. Intermediary Power

The fundamental doctrine propounded by Philo is that of Logos as an intermediary power, a messenger and mediator between God and the world.

And the father who created the universe has given to his archangel and most ancient Logos a pre-eminent gift, to stand on the confines of both, and separate that which had been created from the Creator. And this same Logos is continually a suppliant to the immortal God on behalf of the mortal race, which is exposed to affliction and misery; and is also the ambassador, sent by the Ruler of all, to the subject race. And the Logos rejoices.... saying "And I stood in the midst, between the Lord and you" (Num. 16:48); neither being uncreated as God, nor yet created as you, but being in the midst between these two extremities, like a hostage, as it were, to both parties (Her. 205-206).

When speaking of the high priest, Philo describes the Logos as God's son, a perfect being procuring forgiveness of sins and blessings: "For it was indispensable that the man who was consecrated to the Father of the world [the high priest] should have as a paraclete, his son, the being most perfect in all virtue, to procure forgiveness of sins, and a supply of unlimited blessings" (Mos. 2.134). Philo transforms the Stoic impersonal and immanent Logos into a being who was neither eternal like God nor created like creatures, but begotten from eternity. This being is a mediator giving hope to men and who "was sent down to earth." God, according to Philo, sends "the stream of his own wisdom" to men "and causes the changed soul to drink of unchangeable health; for the abrupt rock is the wisdom of God, which being both sublime and the first of things he quarried out of his own powers." After the souls are watered they are filled with the manna which "is called something which is the primary genus of everything. But the most universal of all things is God; and in the second place is the Logos of God"(LA 2.86). Through the Logos of God men learn all kinds of instruction and everlasting wisdom (Fug. 127-120). The Logos is the "cupbearer of God ... being itself in an unmixed state, the pure delight and sweetness, and pouring forth and joy, and ambrosial medicine of pleasure and happiness" (Somn. 2.249). This wisdom was represented by the tabernacle of the Old Testament which was "a thing made after the model and in imitation of Wisdom" and sent down to earth "in the midst of our impurity in order that we may have something whereby we may be purified, washing off and cleansing all those things which dirty and defile our miserable life, full of all evil reputation as it is" (Her. 112-113). "God therefore sows and implants terrestrial virtue in the human race, being an imitation and representation of the heavenly virtue" (LA 1.45).

l. "God"

In three passages Philo describes the Logos even as God:

a.) Commenting on Genesis 22:16 Philo explains that God could only swear by himself (LA 3.207).
b.) When the scripture uses the Greek term for God ho theos, it refers to the true God, but when it uses the term theos, without the article ho, it refers not to the God, but to his most ancient Logos (Somn. 1.229-230).
c.) Commenting on Genesis 9:6 Philo states the reference to creation of man after the image of God is to the second deity, the Divine Logos of the Supreme being and to the father himself, because it is only fitting that the rational soul of man cannot be in relation to the preeminent and transcendent Divinity (QG 2.62).

Philo himself, however, explains that to call the Logos "God" is not a correct appellation (Somn.1.230). Also, through this Logos, which men share with God, men know God and are able to perceive Him (LA 1.37-38).

m. Summary of Philo's Concept of the Logos

Philo's doctrine of the Logos is blurred by his mystical and religious vision, but his Logos is clearly the second individual in one God as a hypostatization of God's Creative Power - Wisdom. The supreme being is God and the next is Wisdom or the Logos of God (Op. 24). Logos has many names as did Zeus (LA 1.43,45,46), and multiple functions. Earthly wisdom is but a copy of this celestial Wisdom. It was represented in historical times by the tabernacle through which God sent an image of divine excellence as a representation and copy of Wisdom (Lev. 16:16; Her. 112-113). The Divine Logos never mixes with the things which are created and thus destined to perish, but attends the One alone. This Logos is apportioned into an infinite number of parts in humans, thus we impart the Divine Logos. As a result we acquire some likeness to the Father and the Creator of all (Her. 234-236). The Logos is the Bond of the universe and mediator extended in nature. The Father eternally begat the Logos and constituted it as an unbreakable bond of the universe that produces harmony (Plant. 9-10). The Logos, mediating between God and the world, is neither uncreated as God nor created as men. So in Philo's view the Father is the Supreme Being and the Logos, as his chief messenger, stands between Creator and creature. The Logos is an ambassador and suppliant, neither unbegotten nor begotten as are sensible things (Her. 205). Wisdom, the Daughter of God, is in reality masculine because powers have truly masculine descriptions, whereas virtues are feminine. That which is in the second place after the masculine Creator was called feminine, according to Philo, but her priority is masculine; so the Wisdom of God is both masculine and feminine (Fug. 50-52). Wisdom flows from the Divine Logos (Fug. 137-138). The Logos is the Cupbearer of God. He pours himself into happy souls (Somn. 2.249). The immortal part of the soul comes from the divine breath of the Father/Ruler as a part of his Logos.

12. List of abbreviations to Philo's works

Abr. De Abrahamo;
Aet. De Aeternitate Mundi;
Agr. De Agricultura;
Anim. De Animalibus;
Cher. De Cherubim;
Conf. De Confusione Linguarum;
Congr. De Congressu Eruditionis Gratia;
Cont. De Vita Contemplativa;
Decal. De Decalogo;
Det. Quod Deterius Potiori Insidiari Soleat;
Deus. Quod Deus Sit Immutabilis;
Ebr. De Ebrietate;
Flac. In Flaccum;
Fug. De Fuga et Inventione;
Gig. De Gigantibus;
Her. Quis Rerum Divinarum Heres Sit;
Hypoth. Hypothetica;
Jos. De Josepho;
LA  Legum Allegoriarum;
Legat. Legatio ad Gaium;
Mig. De Migratione Abrahami;
Mut. De Mutatione Nominum;
Op. De Opificio Mundi;
Plant. De Plantatione;
Post. De Posteritate Caini;
Praem. De Praemiis et Poenis;
Prob. Quod Omnis Probus Liber Sit;
Prov. De Providentia;
QE  Quaestiones et Solutiones in Exodum;
QG  Quaestiones et Solutiones in Genesim;
Sacr. De Sacrificiis Abelis et Caini;
Sobr. De Sobrietate;
Somn. De Somniis;
Spec. leg. De Specialibus Legibus;
Virt. De Virtutibus.

13. Editions of Philo's works and their translations

The Greek texts of Philo's works:

  • Philonis Judaei Opera Omnia. Textus editus ad fidem optimarum editionum. (Lipsiae: Sumptibus E.B.  Schwickerti, 1828-1829), Vol. 1-6.
  • Philonis Alexandrini Opera Quae Supersunt. Ediderunt Leopoldus Cohn et Paulus Wendland (Berolini: Typis et impensis Georgii Reimeri/ Walther de Gruyter & Co., MDCCCLXXXXVI – MCMXXX, reprinted in 1962). Vols. 1-7.

The Armenian text and its English translation:

  • A. Terian, Philonis Alexandrini De Animalibus: The Armenian Text with an Introduction, Translation, and Commentary. Studies in Hellenistic Judaism, Supplements to Studia Philonica 1. (Chico: Scholars Press, 1981).

Translations of complete works:

  • The Works of Philo. Complete and Unabridged. Translated by Charles Duke Yonge, New Updated Edition. (Hedrickson Publishers, 1995).
  • F. H. Colson and G. H. Whitaker, eds., The Works of Philo (Cambridge, Mass: Loeb Classical Library, Harvard University Press; London: William Heinemann, 1929-1953), Vols. 1-10. Ralph Marcus, ed, Vols 10-12, containing works of Philo available only in Armenian.

Selections of works of Philo in translation:

  • Philo, Selections ed., Hans Lewy in Three Jewish Philosophers (Cleveland, New York, Philadelphia, 1961).
  • Philo of Alexandria, The Contemplative Life, The Giants, and Selections. Translation and Introduction by David Winston. Preface by John Dillon. (New York/ Ramsey/Toronto: Paulist Press, 1981).
  • Ronald  Williamson, Jews in the Hellenistic World: Philo (Cambridge: Cambridge
    University Press, 1989).

14. Major Works on Philo

  • T. H. Billings, The Platonism of Philo Judaeus (Chicago, 1919).
  • H. A. Wolfson, Philo (Cambridge, Mass: Harvard University Press, 1947), Vols 1-2.
  • C. H. Dodd, The Interpretation of the Fourth Gospel (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1963).
  • Ronald Williamson, Philo and the Epistle to the Hebrews (Leiden: E. J. Brill, 1970).
  • R. C. Baer, Philo's Use of the Categories Male and Female (Leiden: E. J. Brill, 1970).
  • S. Sandmel, Philo of Alexandria: An Introduction (New York/Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1979).
  • Harold W. Attridge, The Epistle to the Hebrews (Hermeneia; Philadelphia: Fortress Press, 1989).
  • Dorothy Sly, Philo's Perception of Women (Atlanta: Scholars Press, 1990).
  • Ross Shepard Kraemer, Her Share of the Blessings: Women's religions among Pagans, Jews, and Christians in the Greco-Roman World (NewYork /Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1992).
  • John M. Dillon, The Middle Platonists (Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press, 1977, 1996).

Author Information

Marian Hillar
Center for Philosophy and Socinian Studies

U. S. A.

Plato: Political Philosophy

platoPlato (c. 427-347 B.C.E.) developed such distinct areas of philosophy as epistemology, metaphysics, ethics, and aesthetics. His deep influence on Western philosophy is asserted in the famous remark of Alfred North Whitehead: “the safest characterization of the European philosophical tradition is that it consists of a series of footnotes to Plato.” He was also the prototypical political philosopher whose ideas had a profound impact on subsequent political theory. His greatest impact was Aristotle, but he influenced Western political thought in many ways. The Academy, the school he founded in 385 B.C.E., became the model for other schools of higher learning and later for European universities.The philosophy of Plato is marked by the usage of dialectic, a method of discussion involving ever more profound insights into the nature of reality, and by cognitive optimism, a belief in the capacity of the human mind to attain the truth and to use this truth for the rational and virtuous ordering of human affairs. Plato believes that conflicting interests of different parts of society can be harmonized. The best, rational and righteous, political order, which he proposes, leads to a harmonious unity of society and allows each of its parts to flourish, but not at the expense of others. The theoretical design and practical implementation of such order, he argues, are impossible without virtue.

Table of Contents

  1. Life - from Politics to Philosophy
  2. The Threefold Task of Political Philosophy
  3. The Quest for Justice in The Republic
  4. The Best Political Order
  5. The Government of Philosopher Rulers
  6. Politics and the Soul
  7. Plato’s Achievement

1. Life - from Politics to Philosophy

Plato was born in Athens in c. 427 B.C.E. Until his mid-twenties, Athens was involved in a long and disastrous military conflict with Sparta, known as the Peloponnesian War. Coming from a distinguished family - on his father’s side descending from Codrus, one of the early kings of Athens, and on his mother’s side from Solon, the prominent reformer of the Athenian constitution - he was naturally destined to take an active role in political life. But this never happened. Although cherishing the hope of assuming a significant place in his political community, he found himself continually thwarted. As he relates in his autobiographical Seventh Letter, he could not identify himself with any of the contending political parties or the succession of corrupt regimes, each of which brought Athens to further decline (324b-326a). He was a pupil of Socrates, whom he considered the most just man of his time, and who, although did not leave any writings behind, exerted a large influence on philosophy. It was Socrates who, in Cicero’s words, “called down philosophy from the skies.” The pre-Socratic philosophers were mostly interested in cosmology and ontology; Socrates’ concerns, in contrast, were almost exclusively moral and political issues. In 399 when a democratic court voted by a large majority of its five hundred and one jurors for Socrates’ execution on an unjust charge of impiety, Plato came to the conclusion that all existing governments were bad and almost beyond redemption. “The human race will have no respite from evils until those who are really philosophers acquire political power or until, through some divine dispensation, those who rule and have political authority in the cities become real philosophers” (326a-326b).

It was perhaps because of this opinion that he retreated to his Academy and to Sicily for implementing his ideas. He visited Syracuse first in 387, then in 367, and again in 362-361, with the general purpose to moderate the Sicilian tyrants with philosophical education and to establish a model political rule. But this adventure with practical politics ended in failure, and Plato went back to Athens. His Academy, which provided a base for succeeding generations of Platonic philosophers until its final closure in C.E. 529, became the most famous teaching institution of the Hellenistic world. Mathematics, rhetoric, astronomy, dialectics, and other subjects, all seen as necessary for the education of philosophers and statesmen, were studied there. Some of Plato’s pupils later became leaders, mentors, and constitutional advisers in Greek city-states. His most renowned pupil was Aristotle. Plato died in c. 347 B.C.E. During his lifetime, Athens turned away from her military and imperial ambitions and became the intellectual center of Greece. She gave host to all the four major Greek philosophical schools founded in the course of the fourth century: Plato’s Academy, Aristotle’s Lyceum, and the Epicurean and Stoic schools.

2. The Threefold Task of Political Philosophy

Although the Republic, the Statesman, the Laws and a few shorter dialogues are considered to be the only strictly political dialogues of Plato, it can be argued that political philosophy was the area of his greatest concern. In the English-speaking world, under the influence of twentieth century analytic philosophy, the main task of political philosophy today is still often seen as conceptual analysis: the clarification of political concepts. To understand what this means, it may be useful to think of concepts as the uses of words. When we use general words, such as “table,” “chair,” “pen,” or political terms, such as “state,” “power,” “democracy,” or “freedom,” by applying them to different things, we understand them in a certain way, and hence assign to them certain meanings. Conceptual analysis then is a mental clearance, the clarification of a concept in its meaning. As such it has a long tradition and is first introduced in Platonic dialogues. Although the results are mostly inconclusive, in “early” dialogues especially, Socrates tries to define and clarify various concepts. However, in contrast to what it is for some analytic philosophers, for Plato conceptual analysis is not an end to itself, but a preliminary step. The next step is critical evaluation of beliefs, deciding which one of the incompatible ideas is correct and which one is wrong. For Plato, making decisions about the right political order are, along with the choice between peace and war, the most important choices one can make in politics. Such decisions cannot be left solely to public opinion, he believes, which in many cases does not have enough foresight and gets its lessons only post factum from disasters recorded in history. In his political philosophy, the clarification of concepts is thus a preliminary step in evaluating beliefs, and right beliefs in turn lead to an answer to the question of the best political order. The movement from conceptual analysis, through evaluation of beliefs, to the best political order can clearly be seen in the structure of Plato’s Republic.

3. The Quest for Justice in The Republic

One of the most fundamental ethical and political concepts is justice. It is a complex and ambiguous concept. It may refer to individual virtue, the order of society, as well as individual rights in contrast to the claims of the general social order. In Book I of the Republic, Socrates and his interlocutors discuss the meaning of justice. Four definitions that report how the word “justice” (dikaiosune) is actually used, are offered. The old man of means Cephalus suggests the first definition. Justice is “speaking the truth and repaying what one has borrowed” (331d). Yet this definition, which is based on traditional moral custom and relates justice to honesty and goodness; i.e. paying one’s debts, speaking the truth, loving one’s country, having good manners, showing proper respect for the gods, and so on, is found to be inadequate. It cannot withstand the challenge of new times and the power of critical thinking. Socrates refutes it by presenting a counterexample. If we tacitly agree that justice is related to goodness, to return a weapon that was borrowed from someone who, although once sane, has turned into a madman does not seem to be just but involves a danger of harm to both sides. Cephalus’ son Polemarchus, who continues the discussion after his father leaves to offer a sacrifice, gives his opinion that the poet Simonides was correct in saying that it was just “to render to each his due” (331e). He explains this statement by defining justice as “treating friends well and enemies badly” (332d). Under the pressure of Socrates’ objections that one may be mistaken in judging others and thus harm good people, Polemarchus modifies his definition to say that justice is “to treat well a friend who is good and to harm an enemy who is bad” (335a). However, when Socrates finally objects that it cannot be just to harm anyone, because justice cannot produce injustice, Polemarchus is completely confused. He agrees with Socrates that justice, which both sides tacitly agree relates to goodness, cannot produce any harm, which can only be caused by injustice. Like his father, he withdraws from the dialogue. The careful reader will note that Socrates does not reject the definition of justice implied in the saying of Simonides, who is called a wise man, namely, that “justice is rendering to each what befits him” (332b), but only its explication given by Polemarchus. This definition is, nevertheless, found unclear.

The first part of Book I of the Republic ends in a negative way, with parties agreeing that none of the definitions provided stands up to examination and that the original question “What is justice?” is more difficult to answer than it seemed to be at the outset. This negative outcome can be seen as a linguistic and philosophical therapy. Firstly, although Socrates’ objections to given definitions can be challenged, it is shown, as it stands, that popular opinions about justice involve inconsistencies. They are inconsistent with other opinions held to be true. The reportive definitions based on everyday usage of the word “justice” help us perhaps to understand partially what justice means, but fail to provide a complete account of what is justice. These definitions have to be supplied by a definition that will assist clarity and establish the meaning of justice. However, to propose such an adequate definition one has to know what justice really is. The way people define a given word is largely determined by the beliefs which they hold about the thing referred to by this word. A definition that is merely arbitrary or either too narrow or too broad, based on a false belief about justice, does not give the possibility of communication. Platonic dialogues are expressions of the ultimate communication that can take place between humans; and true communication is likely to take place only if individuals can share meanings of the words they use. Communication based on false beliefs, such as statements of ideology, is still possible, but seems limited, dividing people into factions, and, as history teaches us, can finally lead only to confusion. The definition of justice as “treating friends well and enemies badly” is for Plato not only inadequate because it is too narrow, but also wrong because it is based on a mistaken belief of what justice is, namely, on the belief grounded in factionalism, which Socrates does not associate with the wise ones but with tyrants (336a). Therefore, in the Republic, as well as in other Platonic dialogues, there is a relationship between conceptual analysis and critical evaluation of beliefs. The goals of these conversations are not merely linguistic, to arrive at an adequate verbal definition, but also substantial, to arrive at a right belief. The question “what is justice” is not only about linguistic usage of the word “justice,” but primarily about the thing to which the word refers. The focus of the second part of Book I is no longer clarification of concepts, but evaluation of beliefs.

In Platonic dialogues, rather than telling them what they have to think, Socrates is often getting his interlocutors to tell him what they think. The next stage of the discussion of the meaning of justice is taken over by Thrasymachus, a sophist, who violently and impatiently bursts into the dialogue. In the fifth and fourth century B.C.E., the sophists were paid teachers of rhetoric and other practical skills, mostly non-Athenians, offering courses of instruction and claiming to be best qualified to prepare young men for success in public life. Plato describes the sophists as itinerant individuals, known for their rhetorical abilities, who reject religious beliefs and traditional morality, and he contrasts them with Socrates, who as a teacher would refuse to accept payment and instead of teaching skills would commit himself to a disinterested inquiry into what is true and just. In a contemptuous manner, Thrasymachus asks Socrates to stop talking nonsense and look into the facts. As a clever man of affairs, he gives an answer to the question of “what is justice” by deriving justice from the city’s configuration of power and making it relative to the interests of the dominant social or political group. “Justice is nothing else than the interest of the stronger” (338c). Now, by contrast to what some commentators say, the statement that Thrasymachus offers as an answer to Socrates’ question about justice is not a definition. The careful reader will notice that Thrasymachus identifies justice with either maintenance or observance of law. His statement is an expression of his belief that, in the world imperfect as it is, the ruling element in the city, or as we would say today the dominant political or social group, institutes laws and governs for its own benefit (338d). The democrats make laws in support of democracy; the aristocrats make laws that support the government of the well-born; the propertied make laws that protect their status and keep their businesses going; and so on. This belief implies, firstly, that justice is not a universal moral value but a notion relative to expediency of the dominant status quo group; secondly, that justice is in the exclusive interest of the dominant group; thirdly, that justice is used as a means of oppression and thus is harmful to the powerless; fourthly, that there is neither any common good nor harmony of interests between those who are in a position of power and those who are not. All there is, is a domination by the powerful and privileged over the powerless. The moral language of justice is used merely instrumentally to conceal the interests of the dominant group and to make these interests appear universal. The powerful “declare what they have made - what is to their own advantage - to be just” (338e). The arrogance with which Thrasymachus makes his statements suggests that he strongly believes that to hold a different view from his own would be to mislead oneself about the world as it is.

After presenting his statement, Thrasymachus intends to leave as if he believed that what he said was so compelling that no further debate about justice was ever possible (344d). In the Republic he exemplifies the power of a dogma. Indeed he presents Socrates with a powerful challenge. Yet, whether or not what he said sounds attractive to anyone, Socrates is not convinced by the statement of his beliefs. Beliefs shape our lives as individuals, nations, ages, and civilizations. Should we really believe that “justice [obeying laws] is really the good of another, the advantage of the stronger and the ruler, harmful to the one who obeys, while injustice [disobeying laws] is in one’s own advantage” (343c)? The discussion between Socrates and his interlocutors is no longer about the meaning of “justice.” It is about fundamental beliefs and “concerns no ordinary topic but the way we ought to live” (352d). Although in Book I Socrates finally succeeds in showing Thrasymachus that his position is self-contradictory and Thrasymachus withdraws from the dialogue, perhaps not fully convinced, yet red-faced, in Book II Thrasymachus’ argument is taken over by two young intellectuals, Plato’s brothers, Glaucon and Adeimantus, who for the sake of curiosity and a playful intellectual exercise push it to the limit (358c-366d). Thrasymachus withdraws, but his statement: moral skepticism and relativism, predominance of power in human relations, and non-existence of the harmony of interests, hovers over the Western mind. It takes whole generations of thinkers to struggle with Thrasymachus’ beliefs, and the debate still continues. It takes the whole remainder of the Republic to present an argument in defense of justice as a universal value and the foundation of the best political order.

4. The Best Political Order

Although large parts of the Republic are devoted to the description of an ideal state ruled by philosophers and its subsequent decline, the chief theme of the dialogue is justice. It is fairly clear that Plato does not introduce his fantastical political innovation, which Socrates describes as a city in speech, a model in heaven, for the purpose of practical implementation (592a-b). The vision of the ideal state is used rather to illustrate the main thesis of the dialogue that justice, understood traditionally as virtue and related to goodness, is the foundation of a good political order, and as such is in everyone’s interest. Justice, if rightly understood, Plato argues, is not to the exclusive advantage of any of the city’s factions, but is concerned with the common good of the whole political community, and is to the advantage of everyone. It provides the city with a sense of unity, and thus, is a basic condition for its health. “Injustice causes civil war, hatred, and fighting, while justice brings friendship and a sense of common purpose” (351d). In order to understand further what justice and political order are for Plato, it is useful to compare his political philosophy with the pre-philosophical insights of Solon, who is referred to in a few dialogues. Biographical information about Plato is fairly scarce. The fact that he was related through his mother to this famous Athenian legislator, statesman and poet, regarded as one of the “Seven Sages,” may be treated as merely incidental. On the other hand, taking into consideration that in Plato’s times education would have been passed on to children informally at home, it seems highly probable that Plato was not only well acquainted with the deeds and ideas of Solon, but that these deeply influenced him.

The essence of the constitutional reform which Solon made in 593 B.C.E., over one hundred and fifty years before Plato’s birth, when he became the Athenian leader, was the restoration of righteous order, eunomia. In the early part of the sixth century Athens was disturbed by a great tension between two parties: the poor and the rich, and stood at the brink of a fierce civil war. On the one hand, because of an economic crisis, many poorer Athenians were hopelessly falling into debt, and since their loans were often secured by their own persons, thousands of them were put into serfdom. On the other hand, lured by easy profits from loans, the rich stood firmly in defense of private property and their ancient privileges. The partisan strife, which seemed inevitable, would make Athens even more weak economically and defenseless before external enemies. Appointed as a mediator in this conflict, Solon enacted laws prohibiting loans on the security of the person. He lowered the rate of interest, ordered the cancellation of all debts, and gave freedom to serfs. He acted so moderately and impartially that he became unpopular with both parties. The rich felt hurt by the reform. The poor, unable to hold excess in check, demanded a complete redistribution of landed property and the dividing of it into equal shares. Nevertheless, despite these criticisms from both sides, Solon succeeded in gaining social peace. Further, by implementing new constitutional laws, he set up a “mighty shield against both parties and did not allow either to win an unjust victory” (Aristotle, The Athenian Constitution). He introduced a system of checks and balances which would not favor any side, but took into consideration legitimate interests of all social groups. In his position, he could easily have become the tyrant over the city, but he did not seek power for himself. After he completed his reform, he left Athens in order to see whether it would stand the test of time, and returned to his country only ten years later. Even though in 561 Pisistratus seized power and became the first in a succession of Athenian tyrants, and in 461 the democratic leader Ephialtes abolished the checks upon popular sovereignty, Solon’s reform provided the ancient Greeks with a model of both political leadership and order based on impartiality and fairness. Justice for Solon is not an arithmetical equality: giving equal shares to all alike irrespective of merit, which represents the democratic concept of distributive justice, but it is equity or fairness based on difference: giving shares proportionate to the merit of those who receive them. The same ideas of political order, leadership, and justice can be found in Plato’s dialogues.

For Plato, like for Solon, the starting point for the inquiry about the best political order is the fact of social diversity and conflicting interests, which involve the danger of civil strife. The political community consists of different parts or social classes, such as the noble, the rich, and the poor, each representing different values, interests, and claims to rule. This gives rise to the controversy of who should rule the community, and what is the best political system. In both the Republic and the Laws, Plato asserts not only that factionalism and civil war are the greatest dangers to the city, more dangerous even than war against external enemies, but also that peace obtained by the victory of one part and the destruction of its rivals is not to be preferred to social peace obtained through the friendship and cooperation of all the city’s parts (Republic 462a-b, Laws 628a-b). Peace for Plato is, unlike for Marxists and other radical thinkers, not a status quo notion, related to the interest of the privileged group, but a value that most people usually desire. He does not stand for war and the victory of one class, but for peace in social diversity. “The best is neither war nor faction - they are things we should pray to be spared from - but peace and mutual good will” (628c). Building on the pre-philosophical insights of Solon and his concept of balancing conflicting interests, in both the Republic and the Laws, Plato offers two different solutions to the same problem of social peace based on the equilibrium and harmonious union of different social classes. If in the Republic it is the main function of the political leadership of philosopher-rulers to make the civil strife cease, in the Laws this mediating function is taken over by laws. The best political order for Plato is that which promotes social peace in the environment of cooperation and friendship among different social groups, each benefiting from and each adding to the common good. The best form of government, which he advances in the Republic, is a philosophical aristocracy or monarchy, but that which he proposes in his last dialogue the Laws is a traditional polity: the mixed or composite constitution that reconciles different partisan interests and includes aristocratic, oligarchic, and democratic elements.

5. The Government of Philosopher Rulers

It is generally believed today that democracy, “government of the people by the people and for the people,” is the best and only fully justifiable political system. The distinct features of democracy are freedom and equality. Democracy can be described as the rule of the free people who govern themselves, either directly or though their representatives, in their own interest. Why does Plato not consider democracy the best form of government? In the Republic he criticizes the direct and unchecked democracy of his time precisely because of its leading features (557a-564a). Firstly, although freedom is for Plato a true value, democracy involves the danger of excessive freedom, of doing as one likes, which leads to anarchy. Secondly, equality, related to the belief that everyone has the right and equal capacity to rule, brings to politics all kinds of power-seeking individuals, motivated by personal gain rather than public good. Democracy is thus highly corruptible. It opens gates to demagogues, potential dictators, and can thus lead to tyranny. Hence, although it may not be applicable to modern liberal democracies, Plato’s main charge against the democracy he knows from the ancient Greek political practice is that it is unstable, leading from anarchy to tyranny, and that it lacks leaders with proper skill and morals. Democracy depends on chance and must be mixed with competent leadership (501b). Without able and virtuous leaders, such as Solon or Pericles, who come and go by chance, it is not a good form of government. But even Pericles, who as Socrates says made people “wilder” rather than more virtuous, is considered not to be the best leader (Gorgias, 516c). If ruling a state is a craft, indeed statecraft, Plato argues, then politics needs expert rulers, and they cannot come to it merely by accident, but must be carefully selected and prepared in the course of extensive training. Making political decisions requires good judgment. Politics needs competence, at least in the form of today’s civil servants. Who then should the experts be and why? Why does Plato in the Republic decide to hand the steering wheel of the state to philosophers?

In spite of the idealism with which he is usually associated, Plato is not politically naive. He does not idealize, but is deeply pessimistic about human beings. Most people, corrupted as they are, are for him fundamentally irrational, driven by their appetites, egoistic passions, and informed by false beliefs. If they choose to be just and obey laws, it is only because they lack the power to act criminally and are afraid of punishment (Republic, 359a). Nevertheless, human beings are not vicious by nature. They are social animals, incapable of living alone (369a-b). Living in communities and exchanging products of their labor is natural for them, so that they have capacities for rationality and goodness. Plato, as later Rousseau, believes that once political society is properly ordered, it can contribute to the restoration of morals. A good political order, good education and upbringing can produce “good natures; and [these] useful natures, who are in turn well educated, grow up even better than their predecessors” (424a). Hence, there are in Plato such elements of the idealistic or liberal world view as the belief in education and progress, and a hope for a better future. The quality of human life can be improved if people learn to be rational and understand that their real interests lie in harmonious cooperation with one another, and not in war or partisan strife. However, unlike Rousseau, Plato does not see the best social and political order in a democratic republic. Opinions overcome truth in everyday life. Peoples’ lives and the lives of communities are shaped by the prevailing beliefs. If philosophers are those who can distinguish between true and false beliefs, who love knowledge and are motivated by the common good, and finally if they are not only master-theoreticians, but also the master-practitioners who can heal the ills of their society, then they, and not democratically elected representatives, must be chosen as leaders and educators of the political community and guide it to proper ends. They are required to counteract the destabilizing effects of false beliefs on society. Are philosophers incorruptible? In the ideal city there are provisions to minimize possible corruption, even among the good-loving philosophers. They can neither enjoy private property nor family life. Although they are the rulers, they receive only a modest remuneration from the state, dine in common dining halls, and have wives and children in common. These provisions are necessary, Plato believes, because if the philosopher-rulers were to acquire private land, luxurious homes, and money themselves, they would soon become hostile masters of other citizens rather than their leaders and allies (417a-b). The ideal city becomes a bad one, described as timocracy, precisely when the philosophers neglect music and physical exercise, and begin to gather wealth (547b).

To be sure, Plato’s philosophers, among whom he includes both men and women, are not those who can usually be found today in departments of philosophy and who are described as the “prisoners who take refuge in a temple” (495a). Initially chosen from among the brightest, most stable, and most courageous children, they go through a sophisticated and prolonged educational training which begins with gymnastics, music and mathematics, and ends with dialectic, military service and practical city management. They have superior theoretical knowledge, including the knowledge of the just, noble, good and advantageous, but are not inferior to others in practical matters as well (484d, 539e). Being in the final stage of their education illuminated by the idea of the good, they are those who can see beyond changing empirical phenomena and reflect on such timeless values as justice, beauty, truth, and moderation (501b, 517b). Goodness is not merely a theoretical idea for them, but the ultimate state of their mind. If the life of the philosopher-rulers is not of private property, family or wealth, nor even of honor, and if the intellectual life itself seems so attractive, why should they then agree to rule? Plato’s answer is in a sense a negative one. Philosophical life, based on contemplative leisure and the pleasure of learning, is indeed better and happier than that of ruling the state (519d). However, the underlying idea is not to make any social class in the city the victorious one and make it thus happy, but “to spread happiness throughout the city by bringing the citizens into harmony with each other ... and by making them share with each other the benefits that each class can confer on the community” (519e). Plato assumes that a city in which the rulers do not govern out of desire for private gain, but are least motivated by personal ambition, is governed in the way which is the finest and freest from civil strife (520d). Philosophers will rule not only because they will be best prepared for this, but also because if they do not, the city will no longer be well governed and may fall prey to economic decline, factionalism, and civil war. They will approach ruling not as something really enjoyable, but as something necessary (347c-d).

Objections against the government of philosopher-rulers can be made. Firstly, because of the restrictions concerning family and private property, Plato is often accused of totalitarianism. However, Plato’s political vision differs from a totalitarian state in a number of important aspects. Especially in the Laws he makes clear that freedom is one of the main values of society (701d). Other values for which Plato stands include justice, friendship, wisdom, courage, and moderation, and not factionalism or terror that can be associated with a totalitarian state. The restrictions which he proposes are placed on the governors, rather than on the governed. Secondly, one can argue that there may obviously be a danger in the self-professed claim to rule of the philosophers. Individuals may imagine themselves to be best qualified to govern a country, but in fact they may lose contact with political realities and not be good leaders at all. If philosopher-rulers did not have real knowledge of their city, they would be deprived of the essential credential that is required to make their rule legitimate, namely, that they alone know how best to govern. Indeed, at the end of Book VII of the Republic where philosophers’ education is discussed, Socrates says: “I forgot that we were only playing, and so I spoke too vehemently” (536b), as if to imply that objections can be made to philosophical rule. As in a few other places in the dialogue, Plato throws his political innovation open to doubt. However, in Plato’s view, philosopher-rulers do not derive their authority solely from their expert knowledge, but also from their love of the city as a whole and their impartiality and fairness. Their political authority is not only rational but also substantially moral, based on the consent of the governed. They regard justice as the most important and most essential thing (540e). Even if particular political solutions presented in the Republic may be open to questioning, what seems to stand firm is the basic idea that underlies philosophers’ governance and that can be traced back to Solon: the idea of fairness based on difference as the basis of the righteous political order. A political order based on fairness leads to friendship and cooperation among different parts of the city.

For Plato, as for Solon, government exists for the benefit of all citizens and all social classes, and must mediate between potentially conflicting interests. Such a mediating force is exercised in the ideal city of the Republic by the philosopher-rulers. They are the guarantors of the political order that is encapsulated in the norm that regulates just relations of persons and classes within the city and is expressed by the phrase: “doing one’s own work and not meddling with what isn’t one’s own” (433a-b). If justice is related to equality, the notion of equality is indeed preserved in Plato’s view of justice expressed by this norm as the impartial, equal treatment of all citizens and social groups. It is not the case that Plato knew that his justice meant equality but really made inequality, as Karl Popper (one of his major critics) believed. In the ideal city all persons and social groups are given equal opportunities to be happy, that is, to pursue happiness, but not at the expense of others. Their particular individual, group or class happiness is limited by the need of the happiness for all. The happiness of the whole city is not for Plato the happiness of an abstract unity called the polis, or the happiness of the greatest number, but rather the happiness of all citizens derived from a peaceful, harmonious, and cooperative union of different social classes. According to the traditional definition of justice by Simonides from Book I, which is reinterpreted in Book IV, as “doing one’s own work,” each social class receives its proper due in the distribution of benefits and burdens. The philosopher-rulers enjoy respect and contemplative leisure, but not wealth or honors; the guardian class, the second class in the city, military honors, but not leisure or wealth; and the producer class, family life, wealth, and freedom of enterprise, but not honors or rule. Then, the producers supply the city with goods; the guardians, defend it; and the philosophers, attuned to virtue and illuminated by goodness, rule it impartially for the common benefit of all citizens. The three different social classes engage in mutually beneficial enterprise, by which the interests of all are best served. Social and economic differences, i.e. departures from equality, bring about benefits to people in all social positions, and therefore, are justified. In the Platonic vision of the Republic, all social classes get to perform what they are best fit to do and are unified into a single community by mutual interests. In this sense, although each are different, they are all friends.

6. Politics and the Soul

It can be contended that the whole argument of the Republic is made in response to the denial of justice as a universal moral value expressed in Thrasymachus’ statement: “Justice is nothing else than the interest of the stronger.” Moral relativism, the denial of the harmony of interests, and other problems posed by this statement are a real challenge for Plato for whom justice is not merely a notion relative to the existing laws instituted by the victorious factions in power. In the Laws a similar statement is made again (714c), and it is interpreted as the right of the strong, the winner in a political battle (715a). By such interpretation, morality is denied and the right to govern, like in the “Melian Dialogue” of Thucydides, is equated simply with might. The decisions about morals and justice which we make are for Plato “no trifle, but the foremost thing” (714b). The answer to the question of what is right and what is wrong can entirely determine our way of life, as individuals and communities. If Plato’s argument about justice presented in both the Republic and the Laws can be summarized in just one sentence, the sentence will say: “Justice is neither the right of the strong nor the advantage of the stronger, but the right of the best and the advantage of the whole community.” The best, as explained in the Republic, are the expert philosophical rulers. They, the wise and virtuous, free from faction and guided by the idea of the common good, should rule for the common benefit of the whole community, so that the city will not be internally divided by strife, but one in friendship (Republic, 462a-b). Then, in the Laws, the reign of the best individuals is replaced by the reign of the finest laws instituted by a judicious legislator (715c-d). Throughout this dialogue Plato’s guiding principle is that the good society is a harmonious union of different social elements that represent two key values: wisdom and freedom (701d). The best laws assure that all the city’s parts: the democratic, the oligarchic, and the aristocratic, are represented in political institutions: the popular Assembly, the elected Council, and the Higher Council, and thus each social class receives its due expression. Still, a democratic skeptic can feel dissatisfied with Plato’s proposal to grant the right to rule to the best, either individuals or laws, even on the basis of tacit consent of the governed. The skeptic may believe that every adult is capable of exercising the power of self-direction, and should be given the opportunity to do so. He will be prepared to pay the costs of eventual mistakes and to endure an occasional civil unrest or even a limited war rather than be directed by anyone who may claim superior wisdom. Why then should Plato’s best constitution be preferable to democracy? In order to fully explain the Platonic political vision, the meaning of “the best” should be further clarified.

In the short dialogue Alcibiades I, little studied today and thought by some scholars as not genuine, though held in great esteem by the Platonists of antiquity, Socrates speaks with Alcibiades. The subject of their conversation is politics. Frequently referred to by Thucydides in the History of the Peloponnesian War, Alcibiades, the future leader of Athens, highly intelligent and ambitious, largely responsible for the Athenian invasion of Sicily, is at the time of conversation barely twenty years old. The young, handsome, and well-born Alcibiades of the dialogue is about to begin his political career and to address the Assembly for the first time (105a-b). He plans to advise the Athenians on the subject of peace and war, or some other important affair (107d). His ambitions are indeed extraordinary. He does not want just to display his worth before the people of Athens and become their leader, but to rule over Europe and Asia as well (105c). His dreams resemble that of the future Alexander the Great. His claim to rule is that he is the best. However, upon Socrates’ scrutiny, it becomes apparent that young Alcibiades knows neither what is just, nor what is advantageous, nor what is good, nor what is noble, beyond what he has learned from the crowd (110d-e, 117a). His world-view is based on unexamined opinions. He appears to be the worst type of ignorant person who pretends that he knows something but does not. Such ignorance in politics is the cause of mistakes and evils (118a). What is implied in the dialogue is that noble birth, beautiful looks, and even intelligence and power, without knowledge, do not give the title to rule. Ignorance, the condition of Alcibiades, is also the condition of the great majority of the people (118b-c). Nevertheless, Socrates promises to guide Alcibiades, so that he becomes excellent and renowned among the Greeks (124b-c). In the course of further conversation, it turns out that one who is truly the best does not only have knowledge of political things, rather than an opinion about them, but also knows one’s own self and is a beautiful soul. He or she is perfect in virtue. The riches of the world can be entrusted only to those who “take trouble over” themselves (128d), who look “toward what is divine and bright” (134d), and who following the supreme soul, God, the finest mirror of their own image (133c), strive to be as beautiful and wealthy in their souls as possible (123e, 131d). The best government can be founded only on beautiful and well-ordered souls.

In a few dialogues, such as Phaedo, the Republic, Phaedrus, Timaeus, and the Laws, Plato introduces his doctrine of the immortality of the soul. His ultimate answer to the question “Who am I?” is not an “egoistic animal” or an “independent variable,” as the twentieth century behavioral researcher blatantly might say, but an “immortal soul, corrupted by vice and purified by virtue, of whom the body is only an instrument” (129a-130c). Expert political knowledge for him should include not only knowledge of things out there, but also knowledge of oneself. This is because whoever is ignorant of himself will also be ignorant of others and of political things, and, therefore, will never be an expert politician (133e). Those who are ignorant will go wrong, moving from one misery to another (134a). For them history will be a tough teacher, but as long they do not recognize themselves and practice virtue, they will learn nothing. Plato’s good society is impossible without transcendence, without a link to the perfect being who is God, the true measure of all things. It is also impossible without an ongoing philosophical reflection on whom we truly are. Therefore, democracy would not be a good form of government for him unless, as it is proposed in the Laws, the element of freedom is mixed with the element of wisdom, which includes ultimate knowledge of the self. Unmixed and unchecked democracy, marked by the general permissiveness that spurs vices, makes people impious, and lets them forget about their true self, is only be the second worst in the rank of flawed regimes after tyranny headed by a vicious individual. This does not mean that Plato would support a theocratic government based on shallow religiosity and religious hypocrisy. There is no evidence for this. Freedom of speech, forming opinions and expressing them, which may be denied in theocracy, is a true value for Plato, along with wisdom. It is the basic requirement for philosophy. In shallow religiosity, like in atheism, there is ignorance and no knowledge of the self either. In Book II of the Republic, Plato criticizes the popular religious beliefs of the Athenians, who under the influence of Homer and Hesiod attribute vices to the gods and heroes (377d-383c). He tries to show that God is the perfect being, the purest and brightest, always the same, immortal and true, to whom we should look in order to know ourselves and become pure and virtuous (585b-e). God, and not human beings, is the measure of political order (Laws, 716c).

7. Plato’s Achievement

Plato’s greatest achievement may be seen firstly in that he, in opposing the sophists, offered to decadent Athens, which had lost faith in her old religion, traditions, and customs, a means by which civilization and the city’s health could be restored: the recovery of order in both the polis and the soul.

The best, rational and righteous political order leads to the harmonious unity of a society and allows all the city’s parts to pursue happiness but not at the expense of others. The characteristics of a good political society, of which most people can say “it is mine” (462c), are described in the Republic by four virtues: justice, wisdom, moderation, and courage. Justice is the equity or fairness that grants each social group its due and ensures that each “does one’s own work” (433a). The three other virtues describe qualities of different social groups. Wisdom, which can be understood as the knowledge of the whole, including both knowledge of the self and political prudence, is the quality of the leadership (428e-429a). Courage is not merely military courage but primarily civic courage: the ability to preserve the right, law-inspired belief, and stand in defense of such values as friendship and freedom on which a good society is founded. It is the primary quality of the guardians (430b). Finally, moderation, a sense of the limits that bring peace and happiness to all, is the quality of all social classes. It expresses the mutual consent of both the governed and the rulers as to who should rule (431d-432a). The four virtues of the good society describe also the soul of a well-ordered individual. Its rational part, whose quality is wisdom, nurtured by fine words and learning, should together with the emotional or spirited part, cultivated by music and rhythm, rule over the volitional or appetitive part (442a). Under the leadership of the intellect, the soul must free itself from greed, lust, and other degrading vices, and direct itself to the divine. The liberation of the soul from vice is for Plato the ultimate task of humans on earth. Nobody can be wicked and happy (580a-c). Only a spiritually liberated individual, whose soul is beautiful and well ordered, can experience true happiness. Only a country ordered according to the principles of virtue can claim to have the best system of government.

Plato’s critique of democracy may be considered by modern readers as not applicable to liberal democracy today. Liberal democracies are not only founded on considerations of freedom and equality, but also include other elements, such as the rule of law, multiparty systems, periodic elections, and a professional civil service. Organized along the principle of separation of powers, today’s Western democracy resembles more a revised version of mixed government, with a degree of moderation and competence, rather than the highly unstable and unchecked Athenian democracy of the fourth and fifth century B.C.E., in which all governmental policies were directly determined by the often changing moods of the people. However, what still seems to be relevant in Plato’s political philosophy is that he reminds us of the moral and spiritual dimension of political life. He believes that virtue is the lifeblood of any good society.

Moved by extreme ambitions, the Athenians, like the mythological Atlantians described in the dialogue Critias, became infected by “wicked coveting and the pride of power” (121b). Like the drunken Alcibiades from the Symposium, who would swap “bronze for gold” and thus prove that he did not understand the Socratic teaching, they chose the “semblance of beauty,” the shining appearance of power and material wealth, rather than the “thing itself,” the being of perfection (Symposium, 218e). “To the seen eye they now began to seem foul, for they were losing the fairest bloom from their precious treasure, but to such who could not see the truly happy life, they would appear fair and blessed” (Critias, 121b). They were losing their virtuous souls, their virtue by which they could prove themselves to be worthy of preservation as a great nation. Racked by the selfish passions of greed and envy, they forfeited their conception of the right order. Their benevolence, the desire to do good, ceased. “Man and city are alike,” Plato claims (Republic, 577d). Humans without souls are hollow. Cities without virtue are rotten. To those who cannot see clearly they may look glorious but what appears bright is only exterior. To see clearly what is visible, the political world out there, Plato argues, one has first to perceive what is invisible but intelligible, the soul. One has to know oneself. Humans are immortal souls, he claims, and not just independent variables. They are often egoistic, but the divine element in them makes them more than mere animals. Friendship, freedom, justice, wisdom, courage, and moderation are the key values that define a good society based on virtue, which must be guarded against vice, war, and factionalism. To enjoy true happiness, humans must remain virtuous and remember God, the perfect being.

Plato’s achievement as a political philosopher may be seen in that he believed that there could be a body of knowledge whose attainment would make it possible to heal political problems, such as factionalism and the corruption of morals, which can bring a city to a decline. The doctrine of the harmony of interests, fairness as the basis of the best political order, the mixed constitution, the rule of law, the distinction between good and deviated forms of government, practical wisdom as the quality of good leadership, and the importance of virtue and transcendence for politics are the political ideas that can rightly be associated with Plato. They have profoundly influenced subsequent political thinkers.

Author Information

W. J. Korab-Karpowicz
Anglo-American University of Prague
Czech Republic


These establishments were used for training youths in boxing and wrestling and were also frequented by Socrates and other philosophers. This article contains a discussion of the locations of the palaestrae (wrestling schools) that are known to have existed in Athens, and the the function of these establishments.

Table of Contents

  1. Locations
  2. Function
  3. References and Further Reading

1. Locations

Palaestrae were an integral part of larger gymnasia (areas for general physical training and athletics) and are attested for the three well-known gymnasia areas of Athens (the Academy [Hyperides,Demosthenes, fr. 6], Cynosarges [Diogenes Laertius, 6.30.8 and Aelian, True History 8.14.3], and Lyceum [Pseudo-Plutarch, Lives of the Orators 841d and 843f]). These schools for training in combat sports also existed separately from gymnasia in the city of Athens itself and in the countryside.

As a result of the difficulty of archaeological exploration amidst the urban sprawl of modern Athens, even the general locations of most of the palaestrae outside the major gymnasia areas of Archaic and Classical Athens and Attica are not known with certainty. Only two urban Athenian palaestrae may be roughly located: the palaistra of Taureas and the palaistra where Mikkos was a sophist. The palaistra of Taureas is said by Plato ( Charmides 153a, Lucian, Parasite 43) to have been opposite the sanctuary of Basile. Neither the sanctuary nor the palaistra may be located with any certainty, however, despite Travlos' confident statement that a boundary stone marking an unnamed sanctuary near the corner of modern Syngrou Blvd. and Hatzichristou St. refers to the sanctuary of Basile (Travlos, PDA 332 and fig. 435). The palaistra where Mikkos taught is said by Plato to have been near the Panops fountain, which has been placed in the neighborhood of the Diochares Gates in Northeast Athens (Ritchie, "Lyceum" 253-254 and Travlos, PDA 159-160).

There were palaestrae in the Attic countryside as well. For example, the sanctuary of Artemis at Brauron had both a gymnasium and a palaestra (SEG XL 91). Kephissia possessed a palaistra ( SEG XXXII 147) and it is likely that many of the other demes, especially large ones like Acharnae and Aphidna, had their own as well. There is also the case of the so-called "Palaestra of Cercyon," a palaestra belonging to a mythical person, but associated with an actual place along the Eleusis-Megara road (Bacchylides 18.26, Scholia of Arethas on Lucian 21.21). The travel writer Pausanias (1.39.3) himself visited the site.

Other palaestrae mentioned by the ancient sources include the place where Ariston of Argos trained Plato as a youth (Apuleius, On Plato 1.2 and Suda, s.v. Platon), the palaestra of Hippocrates (Pseudo-Plutarch, Lives of the Orators 837e) where Isocrates died in 337 BC, and the palaestra of Sibyrtios (Plutarch, Alcibiades 3) where a follower of Alcibiades was killed. For the other palaestrae mentioned by the ancient sources there is no indication of place or even number (Kratinos, fr. 176, Lysias, fr. 6.1Teisis, Theophrastus, Characters 7.5, Aelian Varia Historia 4.24.2, Pollux, Onomastica 2.13); some of these unnamed palaestrae may refer to the same structures or they may be independent facilities.

The palaestrae in the Academy, Brauron, Cynosarges, and Lyceum would have come under the superintendence of the cult officials who oversaw the larger gymnasia areas. Other palaestrae appear to have been overseen and regulated by public officials, such as the paidotribes or epistates (Aeschines,Against Timarchus 10). The only firm evidence for the private ownership of a palaestra comes from Theophrastus, who appears in this instance to be describing in extreme and unflattering terms a small, poorly constructed home palaestra (Theophrastus, Characters 21.15-16).

2. Function

The very name palaestra derives from the verb palaiein, meaning "to wrestle." Palaestrae had three basic functions: (1) as training areas for combat sports such as wrestling and boxing, (2) as areas for cult activity, and (3) as meeting places for discussion, philosophical and otherwise. Plato's depiction of Socrates engaging in philosophical discourse provides a most vivid picture of life in the Classical Athenian palaestrae. For example, in Plato's Lysis, it is a palaistra into which Socrates is drawn for a discussion of Eros (Sexual Love) and Philia (Friendship). Within the palaestra, boys play at games with knucklebones and engage in the more serious business of sacrificing to Hermes (Plato, Lysis 206c, Scholia of Arethas on Plato Lysis 206c, Proklos On Plato's Alcibiades 1.195.4). Older men sit on the edges of the enclosure discussing the physical and moral merits of the young men. In P lato's Charmides a similar scene is painted. In this dialogue Socrates returns from battle at Potidaea to the palaestra of Taureas, which is described as one of his regular haunts, and engages Critias and his young cousin Charmides in a discussion of sophrosyne or "temperance."

Plato's choice of the palaestra as a setting for two Socratic dialogues is no accident. Wrestling metaphors recur throughout the Platonic dialogues. For example, in the Phaedrus the conquest of the baser part of the soul by the virtuous part is compared with a wrestling victory in the Olympic games (256b, also compare Protagoras 350e). In part, this use of wrestling metaphors may be an autobiographical touch on the part of Plato, as later tradition tells us that he himself was successful as a young wrestler at the Nemean games (Suda, s.v. Platon). However, the placement of Socrates, a philosopher of the most active sort, amidst those training to fight is most apt. After all, Socrates always sought intellectual contests, not so much for the winning, he would say, but for gaining insight into the truth.

Both as a locale for philosophical discussion and teaching and as a metaphor for a struggle for the truth, palaestrae would continue to be used by philosophers throughout antiquity and become a common leitmotif in the writings of the Church Fathers of Late Antiquity and the Early Middle Ages.

3. References and Further Reading

  • W. Morison, "Attic Gymnasia and Palaistrai: Public or Private?" The Ancient World 31.2 (2000) 140-143.
  • W. Morison, "An Honorary Deme Decree and the Administration of a Palaistra in Kephissia," Zeitschrift für Papyrologie und Epigraphik 131 (2000) 93-98.
  • S. Glass, "The Greek Gymnasium: Some Problems," in The Archaeology of the Olympics, ed. W.J. Raschke. Madison 1988.
  • C.E. Ritchie, "The Lyceum, the Garden of Theophrastos and the Garden of the Muses. A Topographical Reevaluation," in Philia epê. Athens 1986-1989.
  • J. Travlos, Pictorial Dictionary of Ancient Athens. Athens 1971.
  • Wycherley, R.E. The Stones of Athens. Princeton 1978.

Author Information

William Morison
Grand Valley State University

Hellenistic Astrology

fatesHellenistic and Late Antiquity astrologers built their craft upon Babylonian (and to a lesser extent Egyptian) astrological traditions, and developed their theoretical and technical doctrines using a combination of Stoic, Middle Platonic and Neopythagorean thought. Astrology offered fulfillment of a desire to systematically know where an individual stands in relation to the cosmos in a time of rapid political and social changes. Various philosophers of the time took up polemics against astrology while accepting some astral theories. The Stoic philosopher Posidonius was alleged to embrace astrology and write works on it (Augustine, De civitate dei, 5.2). Other Stoics such as Panaetius and (late) Diogenes of Babylon were primarily adverse to astrological determinism. For some philosophers such as Plotinus, horoscopic astrology was absurd for reasons such that the planets could never bear ill will toward human beings whose souls were exalted above the cosmos. For others, such as the early Church Fathers, ethical implications of astrological fatalism were the main point of contention, as it was contrary to the emerging Christian doctrine of free will. The Gnostics, who for the most part believed the cosmos is the product of an evil and enslaving creator, thought of the planets as participants in this material entrapment. Prominent Neoplatonists such as Porphyry, Iamblichus, and Proclus found some aspects of astrology compatible with their versions of Neoplatonic philosophy. The cultural importance of astrology is attested to by the strong reactions to and involvement with astrology by various philosophers in late antiquity. The adaptability of astrology to various philosophical schools as well as the borrowing on the part of astrologers from diverse philosophies provides dynamic examples of the rich "electicism" or "syncretism" that characterized the Hellenistic world.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
    1. Babylonian Astrology in the Hellenized World
    2. Hellenistic Theorization and Systemization of Astrology
  2. Early Greek Thinking
    1. Fate, Fortune, Chance, Necessity
    2. Greek Medicine
    3. Plato and Divination
    4. Ages, Cycles, and Rational Heavens
  3. Philosophical Foundation of Hellenistic Astrology
    1. Astral Piety in Plato's Academy
    2. Stoic Cosmic Determinism
      1. Fate and Necessity
      2. Stoic-Babylonian Eternal Recurrence
      3. Divination and Cosmic Sympathy
      4. The Attitude of Stoic Philosophers Towards Astrology
    3. Middle Platonic and Neopythagorean Developments
      1. Ocellus Lucanus
      2. Timaeus Locrus
      3. Thrasyllus
      4. Plutarch
  4. The Astrologers
    1. The Earliest Hellenistic Astrology: Horoscopic and Katarchic
    2. Earliest Fragments and Texts
    3. Manilius
    4. Claudius Ptolemy of Alexandria
    5. Vettius Valens
  5. The Skeptics
    1. The New Academy (Carneades)
    2. Sextus Empiricus
  6. Hermetic and Gnostic Astrological Theories
  7. Neoplatonism and Astrology
    1. Plotinus
    2. Porphyry
    3. Iamblichus
    4. Firmicus Maternus
    5. Hierocles
    6. Proclus
  8. Astrology and Christianity
  9. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

a. Babylonian Astrology in the Hellenized World

Astrology, loosely defined as a method of correspondences between celestial events and activity in the human realm, has played a role in nearly every civilization. Its role in the late-Hellenistic era is of special concern, particularly due to its complex interaction with Greek philosophy, as well as its claims on the life of an individual. A horoscopic chart (also "birth chart," "natal chart," or "horoscope") is a list of planetary positions against a backdrop of zodiac signs, divided into regions of the sky (with reference to the rising and setting stars on the horizon) on the basis of one's exact time and place of birth. Such charts form the basis of "natal astrology" or "genethlialogy," which started in Babylon but was later developed in Hellenized Greek speaking regions.

The earliest surviving horoscopic chart pertaining to an individual is dated 410 B.C.E. in Babylon. Babylonian astrology flourished from the seventh century to the Seleucid era (late fourth century). However, astral religion and divination based on star omens have a much longer history in Mesopotamia. Stars were considered to be representations of gods whose favors could be courted through prayers, magical incantations and amulets. The triad of Anu, Enlil, and Ea corresponded not with individual stars or planets but to three bands of constellations. Traces of the basic characters of the planetary gods, such as the malevolent nature of Mars/Nergal (the god of destruction and plagues) and Venus/Ištar (the goddess of love), can be found in Hellenistic astrology. Given the small available sample of Late Babylonian horoscopic tablets containing planetary placements and laconic predictions (around 28 extant), it is very difficult to come to solid conclusions about the theoretical ground for the practice of the earliest horoscopic astrologers. The case will be different in the Hellenistic culture in which theoretical grounding was important for the development of the practice, and in which there is more extensive textual evidence.

Given the dynamic tension resulting from Greek philosophy meeting Egyptian, Babylonian, Persian and Jewish religions and ideologies, and the "syncretism" of cross-cultural influences, the Hellenistic era provided fruitful soil for the cultivation of what began primarily as a Mesopotamian system of celestial omens. Before Alexander's conquest, the practice of astronomy and astrology in Babylon flourished but was not yet of much interest to the Greek thinkers. Babylonian priests/astrologers, notably Berossus, who settled on the island of Cos, are thought to be responsible for introducing astrology to Greece and the surrounding area. Plato mentions those who seek celestial portents in the Timaeus (40c-d), while the student of Plato who authored the Epinomis paved the way for application of astronomical studies to astral piety.

As the intellectual center in Egypt, Alexandria is a likely location for major developments in Hellenistic astrology. A portion of what Garth Fowden (in Egyptian Hermes) classified as "technical Hermetica," material typically earlier than the "philosophical Hermetica," represents a part of the early Hellenistic astrological corpus. Surviving Greek astrological writings, catalogued over a period of fifty years in a work called the Catalogus Codicum Astrologorum Graecorum (CCAG), reveal that for the sake of credibility, many of the Hellenistic astrologers attributed the earliest astrological works to historical or mythologized figures such as the pharaoh Nechepso, an Egyptian priest associated with Petosiris. Hermes is a legendary figure credited with the invention of astrology. Some fragments attributed to Hermes survive while some of the Nechepso/Petosiris work from the mid-second century B.C.E. survives in quotes by later authors. Asclepius, Anubio, Zoroaster, Abraham, Pythagoras, and Orpheus are additional figures having astrological works penned in their names. There are late Hellenistic references to three Babylonian astronomers/astrologers, Kidinnu (Kidenas), Soudines (the source of some material for second century C.E. astrologer, Vettius Valens), and Naburianos. The rivalry between the Seleucid and Ptolemaic kingdoms may be reflected in the astrologers' varying attributions of the origins of astrology to Egyptians or Babylonians (called the Chaldaeans). Various astrological techniques and tables are either attributed to Egyptians or Chaldaeans, but by late antiquity, the source for specific techniques and approaches were often wrongly attributed. By the second century B.C.E., Babylonian astrology techniques were combined with Egyptian calendars and religious practices, Hermeticism, the Pythagorean sacred mathematics, and the philosophies of the Stoics and middle Platonists.

b. Hellenistic Theorization and Systemization of Astrology

Hellenistic astrology displays the influence of a variety of philosophical sources. However, given the divergent and ever multiplying streams of thought in the Hellenized world, practical astrology did not necessarily conform to one particular philosophical model offered by the major philosophical schools. However, as outlined below, the Neopythagoreans, Platonists and Stoics provided the foundational influence on the development of the art.

After a system or systems of Hellenistic astrology quickly developed, the later practitioners and writers did not follow any one philosophical influence as a whole. In fact, the surviving instructional texts only scantily betray the philosophical positions of the authors. Vettius Valens, whose Anthologiarum is one of the most valuable sources for historians of this subject, indicates Stoic leanings. The astrologer, astronomer, and geographer whose work greatly influenced later development of astrology, Claudius Ptolemy (fl. 130-150 C.E.), using Aristotelian influenced manners of argumentation that had been absorbed by other Hellenistic schools such as the Middle Platonists and the Academic Skeptics, sought to portray astrology as a natural science, while dismissing a good portion of doctrine due to lack of systematic rigor. The later Platonic Academy had its fair share of astrological interest – head of the academy in the first century C.E., Thrasyllus, for example, acted as an astrologer to Emperor Tiberius and is credited for works on astrology and numerology. Neoplatonists Porphyry, Iamblichus and Proclus all practiced or accepted some form of astrology conforming to their unique contributions to Neoplatonism. It is difficult to imagine that the practice of astrology would have been divorced from philosophy by philosophers who were also astrologers. The idea of astrology, as a systematic account of fate, had a pervasive impact on the influential thinkers of the time who helped to shape the theoretical and cosmological understanding of the practice. Thinkers in the skeptical Academy and Pyrrhonic schools sought to attack the theoretical underpinnings of the practice of astrology, using a variety of arguments centering around freedom, the ontological status of the stars and planets, and the logical or practical limitations of astrological claims.

We now turn to the philosophies and philosophical schools of the Hellenic and Hellenized world that made the spread and acceptance of Babylonian astrology possible.

2. Early Greek Thinking

a. Fate, Fortune, Chance, Necessity

The role of Fate was often interchangeable with that of the gods in early Greek thinking. Fate implied foreknowledge, which was divine and sometimes dispensed by the gods. The intervention of the gods in human affairs also presented the possibility of two paths of fate, based on a moral choice. A decision that pleased or displeased the gods (such as the choice Odysseus must make regarding the Oxen of the Sun (Odyssey, Book XII) could set one off on a road of inexorable circumstances to follow.

For the pre-Socratic philosophers, personified powers - such as Moira (Fate or Destiny) Anankê(Necessity), Nemesis, Heimarmenê (Fate), Sumphora (Chance) and Tukhê (Fortune or Chance) – took on both metaphysical significances and personifications that blurred any distinction between the theological and the ontological. In thinkers such as Anaximander, Moira and Tukhê play a part in cosmology that exceeds and is possibly even prior to the gods. While the Olympian gods may be given foresight into the workings of Moira, they were often left without the power to transgress this transcendental dispensation of justice. Nature and the gods were both encompassed by Moira. At this time in Greek thinking, Fate and Fortune, and Zeus as its capricious dispenser, fell outside the pale of human understanding, for leading a virtuous life was no insurance of protection from material ruin. This sense of futility resulted in the pessimism of Ionian thinkers such as Mimnermus and Semonides. The attitude toward Moira and Tukhê by Archilochus is wholly pessimistic, for Moira and Tukhê were the sole dispensers of good and evil, with no possibility of mediation. We see the emergence of the question of the role of human responsibility in justice and injustice in early Greek thinking (that is, Solon), but it is unusual to see sharp distinctions between circumstantial Fate that dispenses good or evil and the human response to fate through virtue that was to later develop in Hellenistic thinking (such as found in the later Stoic position that happiness is self-control in spite of an immutable Fate). Theognis, however, offers a proto-Stoic forebearance of Fate and triumph of human character, while he expresses the frustration of apparent injustice in the dispensation of good to the wicked and bad to the innocent. Democritus reacted to skepticism based on the whims of Chance by favoring a causal determinism ruled by necessity (anankê). Attribution of events to Chance, he claimed, was an excuse for one's lack of vigilance of the chain of causality (Fr. 119, Diels-Kranz). While not claiming such a thing as absolute chance, Democritus retained chance to indicate an obscure cause or causes.

We find in pre-Socratic thinking a stage set for the overcoming of the limitations of knowledge about the laws of the cosmos, not simply on a universal scale, but on the level of individual fortune as well. Hellenistic astrologers, in part, attempted to provide a complex astral logic to explain the apparent injustices of Fate. They attempted to fill this gap of knowledge and turn Chance and Fate into a predictable science for the initiated.

b. Greek Medicine

The development of Greek medical theory brought about a distinction between a basic "human nature" (koinê phusis) and an "individual nature" (idiê phusis). Greek medicine was motivated by the idea that nature has a unity and lawfulness. In the manner of Democritian Atomism, even Tukhê is causal, but not necessarily predictable. A Hippocratean would classify an individual's psychophysical nature into one of four types based on the qualities of hot, cold, moist, and dry. Astrologers borrowed and elaborated upon the psychology and character typology found in early medical theory (cf. Manilius, Astronomica, 2.453-465; Ptolemy, Tetrabiblos, 3.12.148). In turn, astrology in the Hellenistic era was to in turn inform medical theory with 1) zodiacal and planetary melothesia (the association of astral phenomenon at birth with physical type), 2) iatromathematics (which included consideration of auspicious and inauspicious times), 3) sympathies and antipathies between healing plants and celestial bodies, and 4) prognostication of the course of an illness, of life expectancy or recovery, based on the moment a person fell ill. Melothesia and iatromathematics are found in the works of astrologers Manilius, Teucer (Teukros) of Babylon, Ptolemy, and Firmicus Maternus, as well as a variety of anonymous and pseudepigraphal works. (cf. Serapion, CCAG, 1.101-102; Pythagoras, CCAG, 11.2.124-138).

Galen's own position on astrology was nuanced, for he rejected some aspects of astrological doctrine as it had been applied to medicine (particularly the Pythagorean numerology used in critical days, and the association of thirty-six healing plants with the Egyptian decans), while he supported other astrological considerations such as the Moon phases and relationship to planets for prognosis. Two of his works pertaining directly to this topic, On the Critical Days and Prognostication of Disease by Astrology. InOn the Critical Days Galen claimed an empirical basis for his selective acceptance, favoring astronomical accuracy (with fractional measures) over the Pythagorean doctrines in astrology (such as seven days per quarter cycle of the Moon). A passage in On the Natural Faculties (1.12.29) also alludes to his support of astrology in general and to a lost work on the physician Asclepiades where he dealt with the topics of omen, dreams and astrology. The context of the passage reveals that his theoretical acceptance of astrology is due to his Vitalist view of Nature (that the natural world is a living organism) as opposed to the Atomistic view of Nature (that all things are composed of inanimate atoms). Nature, for Galen (drawing upon the Vitalist position of Hippocrates) possesses faculties of attraction and assimilation of that which is appropriate (e.g., for an organism) and of expulsion of that which is foreign. Nature also provides the soul with innate ideas such as the virtues of courage, wisdom, temperance, etc. Omens and astrology are signs of Nature's providence and artistry of the principles of assimilation and expulsion. The Atomist (Epicurean) school rejected astrology and divination by dreams and omens because they believed there is no causality and purpose in Nature, so there is no means of producing these "signs" or correspondences and no means of prediction by way of them.

c. Plato and Divination

Babylonian astrology was not wholly unknown to the Greeks prior to Alexander's campaign. Plato, for instance, demonstrates an awareness of divination by the stars in the Timaeus dialogue, in which the protagonist criticizes divination by the stars without the means of astronomical calculation (logizethai) and a model (mimêmaton) of the heavens:

To describe the dancing movements of these gods, their juxtapositions and the back-circlings and advances of their circular courses on themselves; to tell which of the gods come into line with one another at their conjunctions and how many of them are in opposition, and in what order and at which times they pass in front of or behind one another, so that some are occluded from our view to reappear once again, thereby bring terrors and portents of things to come to those who cannot reason – to tell all this without the use of visible models would be labor spend in vain. 40c-d, Donald J. Zeyl translation, emphasis mine).

Each astronomical consideration listed in this passage, the conjunctions and oppositions, the occlusion or heliacal settings of planets and stars, the retrogradation are basic considerations in Babylonian (and subsequently Greek) astronomy. This passage may allude to early exposure of the Greeks to astrological methods more akin to numerology rather than based on astronomical observation, for the use of visible models can more accurately measure celestial phenomena. It may also be taken as evidence that Plato is at least aware of the Babylonian practice of omenic astrology or the horoscopy that emerged in the fifth century B.C.E. Also in the Timaeus, Plato mentions the "young gods" whose job it is to steer souls. The identity of these gods would become a problem in later Platonism, but they are established, at least by the first century as planetary god (Philo, De opificio mundi, 46-47). As this dialogue was treated with great importance in Platonism during the formative period of Hellenistic astrology, this passage could have been used by those looking for philosophical justification for the practice. Plato further expresses in the Laws(7.821a-822c; 10.986e) the value of studying astronomy for the sake of astral piety. He points out that the name planetos (from "to wander") is a misnomer, for the Sun, Moon and planets display a cyclical regularity in their course that can be more accurately understood by astronomical research. We can suspect, in this regard, the influence of contemporary astronomers and students in the academy such as Eudoxus. Astral piety, however, is to be contrasted with "astrology" proper that originated with the attempt to apply reason, order, and predictability to phenomena that had been previously considered to be merely astral omens.

Plato held in low regard the divinatory arts that are not prophetic, i.e., a madness (manic/mantic) directly inspired by the gods (cf. Ion). He expressed an attitude of ambiguity toward divination revealed in the double-edged characterization of Theuth (cf. Phaedo, 274a), the inventor of number, calculation, geometry, astronomy, games and writing. Just as writing results in a soul's forgetfulness through the mediation of symbols, semiotic or sign-based prediction, as astrology was often considered, is inferior to directly inspired prophecy (Phaedo, 244c).

d. Ages, Cycles, and Rational Heavens

As early as Hesiod, the Greeks mythologized ages of civilization. The Golden Age, in which the gods walked upon the earth, gave way to Silver, then Bronze, then Iron Age. Empedocles taught of a natural cycle of the interplay of Love and Strife: Love and harmony dominated one Age, then Strife in the next Age. Plato also expresses world ages, particularly in the Statesman or Politicus (269d-274d). Throughout the myths in this dialogue and others, he introduced the notion of a "cosmos" or a rational order and ontological hierarchy of the spheres of heavenly beings, elements, daimons, and earthly inhabitants. The cosmologies in Plato's dialogues marked the emergence of a rational cosmic order in place of earlier cosmogonies. His Timaeus dialogue, with its detailed story of the creation of the world, was to become, perhaps the most influential book along with the Septuagint in the late Hellenistic era). Babylonian astronomical cycles would, soon after Plato, fuse with Greek cosmologies. In the Myth of Er in the Republic, Plato describes the cosmos as held together by the Spindle of Necessity, such that the spheres of the fixed stars and the planets are held together by an axis of a spindle. Sirens sing to move the spheres (or whorls) while the Three Moirai participate in turning the wheel. Each whorl has its own speed, with the sphere of the fixed stars moving the fastest and in the direction opposite those of the planets. In the Phaedrus (245c-248c) dialogue, he further illustrates the Law of Destiny that governs souls who accompany the procession of the gods in a heavenly circuit for a period of 1000 years. If the souls remember the Good (those of the philosophers) they will regain lost wings of immortality in three circuits or 3000 years. Otherwise they fall to the earth and continue a cycle of rebirths for 10,000 years. Immortal souls dwell in the rim of the heavens among the stars.

This leads to another significant development introduced by Plato, one that would become critical for the Hellenistic spread of astrology and astral piety - the ensouled nature of celestial bodies. Plato gives the planets and stars a divine ontological status absent in the writings of the pre-Socratics, many of whom took the planets and stars to be material bodies of one substance or another. (for example, Anaxagoras [Plato,Apology, 26d]; Xenophanes [Aetius, De placitis reliquiae, 347.1]; Anaximander [Aristotle De caelo, 295b10]; Leucippus and Democritus [Diogenes Laertius, Lives, 9.30-32]). In the Laws (10.893b-899d; 12.966e-967d), Plato posits that Soul is older than created things and an immanent governor of the world of changing matter. Secondly, the motion of the stars and other heavenly bodies are under the systematic governance of Nous. That the circuits of the planets and stars have an ordered regularity or rationality, and that they are always in motion, indicates that they are immortal and ensouled (cf. Phaedrus, 245c). While leaving open the question of whether the Sun, Moon and planets create their own physical bodies or inhabit them as vehicles, Plato includes in the Athenian's argument that celestial beings are in fact gods, and (unlike the thought of the Atomists) are engaged in the affairs of human beings (Laws, 10.899a-d). Pre-Socratic philosophers such as Anaxagoras who believed that mind (Nous) governs the cosmos, failed in their cosmological account by not also recognizing the priority of soul over body (Laws, 12.967b-d). The conception of mind moving soulless bodies, noted the Athenian, led to common accusations that studying astronomy promotes impiety.

As Babylonian astronomical cycles met with a rational and ensouled Greek cosmos, the basis for both Stoic eternal recurrence and technical Hellenistic astrology was formed.

3. Philosophical Foundation of Hellenistic Astrology

a. Astral Piety in Plato's Academy

The Platonic dialogue Epinomis, most likely written by Phillip of Opus, demonstrates a transformation of the view of the heaven that soon paved the "western way" for astrology. This dialogue shows the transformation of the planets into visible representations of the Olympian gods, just as the Babylonian planets were images of their pantheon. The older names of the planets encountered in Homer and Hesiod (and in Plato's Republic) designated their appearance rather than divine personification. Jupiter was shining (Phaithon), Mercury was twinkling (Stilbôn), Mars was fiery (Pureos) and Venus was the bright morning star and evening star (Phosphoros and Vesperos). In the Epinomis, the planets are given proper names for Greek gods, though the author leaves open the question of whether the celestial beings are the gods themselves or likenesses fashioned by the gods (theous autous tauta humnêteon orthotata, ê gar theous eikonas hôs agalmata hupolabein gegonenai, theôn autôn ergasamenon, 983e). The new names of planets as Greek gods corresponded loosely with the astral deities of Babylonian astrology, such as the identification of ruling Olympian, Zeus, with the planet Jupiter, replacing the principle Babylonian god Marduk. Ištar (female as evening star, male as morning star) became Aphroditê/Venus, Nergal (god of destruction) Ares/Mars, Nabu Hermes/Mercury, Ninib Kronos/Saturn, and Sin became the female lunar deity Selênê.

The author of Epinomis extends the sentiment of astral piety evident in the Laws, and goes so far as to say that the highest virtue is piety, and that astronomy is the art/science that leads to this virtue (989b-990a) – for it teaches the orderliness of the celestial gods, harmony, and number. While Plato himself would never place the heavenly gods in direct control of a person's destiny, the distinction between the fatalism of such a control measured by astrology and an astral piety that permitted some intervention of gods in human affairs was not sharply drawn. Does the care of the gods for "all things great and small" (epimeloumenoi pantôn, smikrôn kai meizonôn, 980d) mean that it is through their activities or motions they control, guide or occasionally intervene in human matters? While we do not yet see a clear distinction between astral piety and practical astrology, later texts on mystery cults, Gnosticism, Hermeticism, and magic demonstrate that someone who either worships stars, or is concerned with their ontological status, need not be technically proficient in astronomy. Nor must they believe that life is fated by astrally determined necessity. Likewise, the technical Hellenistic astrologers who calculated birth charts and made predictions did not necessarily practice rituals in reverence to planetary gods. While there is no clear evidence for a unified school in which technical astrologers were indoctrinated into both technique and theory of the craft, the fact that the Hellenistic techniques (barring the basic foundation of Babylonian astrology) had developed in a variety of conflicting ways speaks to the possibility of several schools of thought in theory, practice, and perhaps geographic distance. As each astrologer contributed their own techniques or variations on techniques, the technical material quickly multiplied, and students of astrology had many authoritative writers to follow. The most likely scenario is that the practicing astrologers possessed a variety of viewpoints about the life and "influence" of the planets and stars, based on available cosmological views in religion and philosophy. While borrowing freely from Stoic, Pythagorean and Platonic thought, the astrologers who would soon emerge varied theoretically on issues such as which aspects of earthly existence may or may not be subject to Fate and the influence of the stars, and whether or not the soul is affected by celestial motions and relationships.

b. Stoic Cosmic Determinism

Although the founder of Stoicism, Zeno of Citium, integrated fate into the system of physics, the first Stoic to write a treatise On Fate (Peri heimarmenês) is Chrysippus of Soli (280-207 B.C.E.). Xenocrates and Epicurus both penned lost works of the same title prior to his (Diog. Laert., 4.12; 10.28). Given the influence of Xenocrates on the Stoa on matters as important as oikeôisis, there is no reason to think that all of the issues of fate and freedom discussed by Chrysippus originate with him. Later Stoics such as Boethus, Posidonius and Philopator, dedicated works to fate, a topic that would become a critical issue for all Hellenistic schools of thought. The development of Hellenistic astrology is placed in the context of these theories.

i. Fate and Necessity

Stoic theory of fate involves the law of cause and effect, but unlike Epicurean atomism, it is not a purely mechanistic determinism because at the helm is divine reason. Logos, for the Stoics, was the causal principle of fate or destiny. This principle is not simply external to human beings, for it is disseminated through the cosmos as logos spermatikos (seminal reason) which is particularly concentrated in humans who are subordinate partners of the gods. Individual logoi are related to the cosmic logos through living in harmony with nature and the universe. This provided the basis of Stoic ethics, for which there is the goal of eupoia biou or smooth living rather than fighting with the natural and fated order of things. Chrysippus makes a distinction between fate (heimarmenê) and necessity (anankê) in which the former is a totality of antecedent causes to an event, while the latter is the internal nature of a thing, or internal causes. By its nature, a pot made of clay can be shattered, but the actual events of the shattering of a specific pot are due to the sum total of external causes and inner constraints. Fate, in general, encompasses the internal causes, though to be fated does not exclude the autonomy of individuals because particular actions are based on internal considerations such as will and character. Some events are considered to be co-fated by both external circumstances and conscious acts of choice. Diogenianus gives examples of co-fatedness, e.g., the preservation of a coat is co-fated with the owner's care for it, and the act of having children is co-fated with a willingness to have intercourse (Stoicorum veterum fragmenta, 2.998). Character or disposition also plays a part in determining virtue and vice. Polemical writers such as Alexander of Aphrodisias characterize the Stoic position as maintaining that virtue and vice are innate. However, it is more accurate to say that for the Stoics an individual is born morally neutral, though with a natural inclination towards virtue (virtue associated with reason/logos) that can be enhanced through training or corrupted through neglect. Though morally neutral at birth, a human being is not a tabula rasa, but has potentialities which make him more or less receptive to good and bad influences from the environment. An individual cannot act contrary to his or her character, which is a combination of innate and external factors, but there is the possibility of acquiring a different character, as a sudden conversion. Since character determines action the ethical responsibility rests with the most immediate causes. An often cited example is that of a cylinder placed on a hill – the initial and external cause of being pushed down the hill represents the rational order of fate, while its naturally rollable shape represents will and character of the mind (Aulus Gellius, Noctes Atticae, 7.2.11). Cultivation of character through knowledge and training was thought to result in "harmonious acceptance of events" (which are governed by the rational plan of the cosmos), whereas lack of culture results in the errors of pitting oneself against fate (Gellius, 7.2.6).

ii. Stoic-Babylonian Eternal Recurrence

Berossus, a Babylonian priest who settled on the island of Cos and the author of Babuloniakos, is often credited for bringing Babylonian astrology to the Greek-speaking world. Because he is thought to have flourished around 280 B.C.E., he is not the first to expose Greek speakers to this art, but he is known for founding an astronomical and astrological school. Kidinnu and Soudines, two Babylonian astronomers mentioned by second century C.E. Vettius Valens, also contributed to Hellenistic astronomy and astrology. Although many of the technical and theoretical details of pre-Hellenistic Babylonian astrology in Greece are lost in all but a few tablets, the doctrine of apokatastasis or eternal recurrence is attributed to Berossus by Seneca (Quaest. nat., 3.2.1). One scholar of the history of astronomy (P. Schnabel,Berossus und die babylonisch-hellenistische Literatur, Leipzig 1923) argued that Kidinnu possessed a theory of "precession of the equinox" prior to Hipparchus. Precession occurs due to a slight rotation of the earth's axis resulting in a cyclical slippage of the vernal point in reference to the stars. (See section on Ptolemy for more on precession) From this was concluded an eternal recurrence based on the precession of the vernal point through the constellations. Schnabel's theory, however, had been refuted by Neugebauer. Whatever the case may be, it is likely that Babylonian cosmological theories influenced the founding Stoics, particularly Chrysippus.

The early Stoic version of the eternal recurrence is that a great conflagration (ekpurôsis) marks a stage in the cycle of the reconstitution of the cosmos (apokatastasis). One cycle, a Great Year (SVF, 2.599), would last until the planets align in their original position or zodiac sign in the cosmos (SVF, 2.625). Each age would end in Fire, the purest of elements and the irreducible cosmic substance, and would be followed by a restoration of all things. This fire, for the Stoics, was a "craftsmanly fire" (pur tekhnikonidentified with Zeus and of a different nature than the material fire that was one of the four elements. In the reconstitution of the world, the fiery element would interact with air to create moisture, which then condenses into earth. The four elements would then organize in their proper measures to create living beings (SVF, 1.102). By Necessity, the principle cohesive power of the cosmos, the same souls which existed in one cycle would then be reconstituted in the cosmos and would play the same part in the same way, with perhaps an insignificant variation or two. This concept from the early Stoa is sometimes known as the "eternal recurrence." Because human souls are rational seeds of God (Logos, Zeus, Creative Fire), the conflagration is an event in which all souls return to the pure substance of creative fire (pur technikon), Zeus. This is not to be understood as an "afterlife" of human souls, as one would find in Christianity, for example. God, then restored in his own completion, assesses the lives of the previous cycle and fashions the next great age of the world that will contain an identical sequence of events. Heraclitus, whom the Stoics claimed as a precursor, possessed an earlier doctrine of conflagration, though it is not to be assumed that his generation and decay of the cosmos was measured by the planetary circuits, for its movement, to him, is a pathway up and down rather than circular (Diog. Laert., 9. 6). As reported by Philo, the only Stoics to have rejected the eternal recurrence include Boethus of Sidon, Panaetius, and a mature Diogenes of Babylon (De aeternitate mundi, 76-7).

Astrological configurations were specified as part of the Stoic-Babylonian theory of eternal recurrence. According to Nemesius,

The Stoics say that when the planets return to the same celestial sign [sêmeion], in length and breadth [mêkos kai platos], where each was originally when the world was first formed, at the set periods of time they cause conflagration and destruction of existing things. Once again the world returns anew to the same condition as before; and when the stars are moving again in the same way, each thing that occurred in the previous period will come to pass indiscernibly. (SVF, 2.625, tr. Long and Sedley, Hellenistic Philosophers V. 1, p. 309).

The word sêmeion used by Nemesius could represent any celestial indicator, though the typical word for "sign of the zodiac" was zôidion. The celestial position of "length and breath" (latitude and longitude) is more specifically identified by second century C.E. astrologer Antiochus as the last degree of the zodiac sign of Cancer or the first degree of Leo. A variation of this theory of apokatastasis includes anantapokatastatis, which is an additional destruction by water which occurs when the planets align in the opposing sign, Capricorn. Such destruction by a Great Flood during this alignment was also attributed to Berossus by Seneca. Fourth century astrologer turned Christian, Firmicus Maternus, associatedapokatastasis with the Thema Mundi (or Genesis Cosmos), which is a "birth chart" for the world consisting of each planet in the 15th degree of its own sign. For the sake of consistency with the Stoic eternal cosmos, Firmicus claimed this chart does not indicate that the world had any original birth in the sense of creation, particularly one that could be conceived of by human reason or empirical observation. The Great Year contains all possible configurations and events. Because it exceeds the span of human records of observation, there is no way of determining the birth of the world. He claimed that the schema had been invented by the Hermetic astrologers to serve as an instructional tool often employed as allegory (Mathesis, 3.1). A more common Genesis Cosmos mentioned in astrological texts is a configuration of all planets in their own signs and degrees of exaltation hupsoma), special regions that had been established in Babylonian astrology.

iii. Divination and Cosmic Sympathy

The eternal recurrence doctrine in Stoicism entails justification of divination and belief in the predictability of events. The Sun, Moon and planets, as gods, possess the pur technikon and are not destroyed in theekpurôsis (SVF, 1.120). While their physical substance is destroyed, they maintain an existence as thoughts in the mind of Zeus. Because the gods are indestructible, they maintain memory of events that take place within a Great Year and know everything that will happen in the following cycles (SVF, 2.625). Divination, for Stoicism, is therefore possible, and even a divine gift. Stoics who accepted divination include Chrysippus, Diogenes of Babylon, and Antipater (SVF, 2.1192). The presupposition that divination is a legitimate science was also used by Chrysippus as an argument in favor of fate. Cicero, however, argued for the incompatibility of divination and Stoicism (De fato, 11-14), particularly the incompatibility between Chryssipus' modal logical (which allows for non-necessary future truths) and the necessary future claimed by divination's power of prediction. These non-necessary future truths include all things that happen "according to us" (eph' hêmin). The example argument presented by Cicero, "If someone is born at the rising of the Dogstar, he will not die at sea," would not, by his account, fall under the category of non-necessary truths since the antecedent truth is necessary (as a past true condition). Therefore the conclusion would also be necessary according to Chrysippus' logic. Cicero mentions Chrysippus' defense against charges of such contradictions, but regardless of the success or failure of Chysippus' defense against them, the issue for the possibility of divination, for the Stoics, was not considered a logical contradiction between fate and free will. The eph hêmin in Stoicism was based on a disposition of character that, while not a causal necessity, would lead one to make decisions between the good, bad, and indifferent in accordance with nature. Because human beings are by nature the rational seeds (logoi spermatikoi) of the Godhead, their choices will correspond to the cosmic fate inherent in the eternal recurrence, and would not alter that which is divined. For Chrysippus, at least, the laws of divination are accepted as empirically factual (or proto-science) and not as a matter of logicalconnectivity between past, present, and future. Since divination occurs as a matter of revelation thoughsigns, the idea that there can be knowledge of a necessary causal antecedent leading to a future effect is not the principle behind it (cf. Bobzein, p. 161-170). The Stoic argument for divination through signs would be as follows: if there are gods, they must both be aware of future events and must love human beings while holding only good intentions toward them. Because of their care for human beings, signs are then given by the gods for potential knowledge of future events. These events are known by the gods, though not alterable by them. If signs are given, then the proper means to interpret them must also be given. If they are not interpreted correctly, the fault does not lie with the gods or with divination itself, but with an error of judgment on the part of the interpreter (Cicero, De divinatione, 1.82-3; 1.117-18).

Another theory in support of divination and by extension astral divination, is that of cosmic sympathy. Cosmic sympathy was already prevalent in Hipparchean medical theory, though Posidonius is credited for its development in the Stoic school. Posidonius, though, claimed to have drawn this notion from Democritus, Xenophanes, Pythagoras and Socrates. Stoic physical theory holds that all things in the universe are connected and held together in their interactions through tension. The active and passive principles move pneuma, the substance that penetrates and unifies all things. In fact, this tension holds bodies together, and every coherent thing would collapse without it. Pneuma as the commanding substance of the soul penetrates the cosmos. This cosmos, for the Stoics, is both a rational and sensate living being (Diog. Laert., 7.143). The Stoics thought that the cosmos is ensouled and has impulses or desires (hormai). Whereas in Platonism these impulses are conflicting and need the rational part of the soul to govern them, in Stoicism desires of the cosmic soul are harmoniously drawn toward a rational (though not entirely accessible to human beings) end, which is Logos, or Zeus' return to himself through the cosmic cycle of apokatastasis. So the idea of cosmic sympathy supports divination, because knowledge of one part of the cosmos (such as a sign) is, by way of the cohesive substance of pneuma, access to the whole. In contrast to Plato's disparaging view of divination that it is not divinely inspired but based on the artless fumbling of human error, the Stoic view, for the most part, is that rational means of divination can be developed. The push to develop a scientific (meaning systematic and empirical) knowledge-based divination finds its natural progression in mathematically based astrology.

Stoic-influenced astrologers went a step further than Stoic philosophers to define innate potentials of character by assigning them to the zodiac and planets. Virtuous and corrupt characteristics are identified as determined by the potential of the natal chart, while external circumstances are indicated by the combination of this chart with transits of planets through time and certain periods of life set in motion by the configurations in the natal chart. For instance, in his list of personality characteristics for individuals born with certain zodiac signs on the horizon, Teukros of Babylon (near Cairo) includes character traits that are not morally neutral. For example, those born when the first decan of Libra is ascending are "virtuous" (enaretous), while those born when the third decan of Scorpio is ascending "do many wrongs" or are "law-breakers" (pollous adikountas).

iv. The Attitude of Stoic Philosophers Towards Astrology

While it is clear that Stoic philosophy influenced the development of astrology, the attitude of the Stoa towards astrology, however, varied on the basis of the individual philosophers. Cicero stated that Diogenes of Babylon believed astrologers are capable of predicting disposition and praxis (one's life activity), but not much else. Diogenes, though, is said to have calculated a "Great Year" in his earlier years (Aetius, De placitis reliquiae, 364.7-10). His turn to skepticism changed his view on Stoic ekpurosisand likely modified his view on astrology. Middle Stoic Panaetius is said to have rejected astrology altogether. That an astrological example is used by Cicero to illustrate a contradiction in Chrysippus' logic and divination does not necessarily mean that Chrysippus himself had much exposure to or took an interest in astrology. (Cicero's example is, "If someone is born at the rising of the Dogstar, he will not die at sea." Si quis (verbi causa) oriente Canicula natus est, is in mari non morietur. De fato, 12). In Chrysippus' time, Hellenistic astrology had not yet been formulated systematically. However, given that the example is based on a consideration of importance to Babylonian astrology, the rising of the fixed star Sirius, the possibility exists that Chrysippus or one of his contemporaries discussed astrology in the context of logic and divination.

Posidonius was alleged by Augustine to have been "much given to astrology" (multum astrologiae deditus) and "an assertor fatal influence of the stars" (De civitate dei 5.2). His actual relationship to astrology, however, is more complicated, but there are several reasons to think that he supported astrology. For one, in his belief that the world is a living animal, he followed Chrysippus in identifying the commanding faculty of the world soul as the heavens (Diog. Laert., 7.138-9. Cleanthes considered it to be the Sun). Secondly, Posidonius had a strong research interest in astronomy and meteorology. He was the first to systematically research the connection between ocean tides and the phases of the Moon. His research in this area possibly led him to his doctrine of cosmic sympathy, as he considered natural affinities among things of the earth. Cosmic sympathy allows for an association between signs (within nature that can extend to planets and stars) and future events without direct causality. If the higher faculty of the cosmos is located in the heavens, then it is more likely that these signs would carry weight for Posidonius. Thirdly, Cicero, who can be given more credibility than Augustine by having attended Posidonius' lectures, mentions him in connection with astrology in De divinatione (1.130). Fourthly, Posidonius (as a Platonic-influenced thinker) believed idea that the signs of the zodiac (zôdia) are ensouled bodies - living beings (Fr. 149, Edelstein-Kidd / Fr. 400a, Theiler). However, given that Posidonius is flourishing at the same time as the earliest textual evidence for Hellenistic astrology (first century B.C.E.; some "technical" Hermetic fragments about Solar and Lunar observations may be earlier), it is difficult to say what type of astrology he would have had an interest in – whether it had been remnants of the Babylonian omen-based astrology, or the beginning formulation of a systematic Greco-Roman astrology. Because he was widely traveled, he may have gained exposure to one or more astrologers or schools of astrologers. With his observations of the connection between seasonal fluctuations of the tides and the Solar/Lunar cycles, he apparently refuted Seleucus, a Babylonian astronomer who believed that the tides also fluctuation according to the zodiac sign in which the Moon would fall; he claimed the tides were regular when the Moon would be in the equinoctial signs of Aries or Libra and irregular in the solstitial signs of Capricorn, Cancer (Fr. 218, Edelstein-Kidd / Fr. 26, Theiler). This observation would not have necessarily been considered an astrological one, though it is schematized according to characteristics of the zodiac rather than lunations and seasons, and such schematizations were quite common in Hellenistic astrology. It cannot be said with certainty whether Posidonius' advocacy of cosmic sympathy lent support to the development of astrology or if this development itself reinforced Posidonius' own theories of cosmic sympathy and fate.

The importance of astrology in politics of first century Rome was aided by its alignment with Stoic fatalism and cosmic sympathy. Balbillus, son of Thrasyllus and astrologer to Nero, Seneca, and a certain Alexandrian Stoic, Chaeremon, were all appointed tutors to L. Domitius. Chaeremon (who Cramer, p. 116, identifies with the Egyptian priest/astrology in Porphyry's Letter to Anebo and in Eusebius'Praeparatio evang., 4.1) wrote a work on comets (peri komêtôn suggramma) that cast these typically foreboding signs in a favorable light. Seneca, too, wrote a work on comets (Book 7 of Quaestiones naturales), in which he portrays some as good omens for the Empire (cf. Cramer, p. 116-118).

c. Middle Platonic and Neopythagorean Developments

So far in this account of the theoretical development of Hellenistic astrology, the pre-Socratic thinkers contributed a deep concern for fate and justice. Plato contributed an orderly and rational cosmos, while those in the early Academy displayed an astral piety that recognized the planets as gods or representations of gods. The Stoics contributed theories of fate and divination, that already had an astrological component with the Babylonian contribution to the Eternal Recurrence. Cosmic sympathy, present in Greek medicine and popularized by the middle Stoic Posidonius, provided astrologers with a theoretical grounding for the associations among planets, zodiac signs, and all other things. One notable Stoic contribution to Hellenistic astrology which distinguishes it from the Babylonian is the incorporation of Chryssipus' principle of two forces, active and passive, manifest in the activities of the four elements. Fire and air were active, earth and water passive. The astrologers later assigned these elements and dynamic qualities to each sign of the zodiac. Further philosophical developments by the Middle Platonists and the Neopythagoreans would then lead to astrology as a system of knowledge due to its systematic and mathematical nature. The systematic nature would make it plausible to some and a worthy or dangerous foe to others. These developments set astrology apart, epistemologically speaking, from other manners of divination such as haruspicy (study of the liver of animals), or dream interpretation.

The union between Pythagorean theory and Platonism should come as no surprise given Plato's late interest in Pythagoreanism. From the early academy onward, elements of Pythagorean theory became part and parcel of Platonism. Speusippus wrote a work on Pythagorean numbers (Fr. 4), and he would become influential in this regard, if not as directly on subsequent Academy members as on Neopythagorean circles. He and Xenocrates both offered cosmic hierarchies formed from the One and the Dyad. The One, or Monad, is a principle of order and unity, while the Dyad is the principle of change, motion, and division. The manner in which these principles are related was a critical issue inherited from the early Academy. Xenocrates (Fr. 15) believed that stars are fiery Olympian Gods and in the existence of sublunary daimons and elemental spirits. We see in Xenocrates both the identification of Gods with stars (as we saw in Phillip of Opus) and the notion that Gods are forces of Nature, thereby creating an important theoretical issue for astrology, namely what is the domain of influence of the planetary gods, as the Olympians are identified with the planets. He also believed that the world soul is formed from Monad and Dyad, and that it served as a boundary between the supralunary and sublunary places. Xenocrates' cosmology would be highly influential on Plutarch, who elaborated on the roles of the world soul, the daimons, the planets and fixed stars.

The middle Platonists, many of whom believed themselves to be true expounders of Plato, were influenced by other schools of thought. The physical theories of Antiochus of Ascalon are very Stoic in nature. For example, he incorporated the Stoic "qualities" (poiotêtes), which were moving vibrations that act upon infinitely divisible matter, into his cosmology. The unity of things is held together by the world soul (much as it is held together in Stoic theory by pneuma). Antiochus equated the Stoic Logos/Zeus with the Platonic World Soul, and this soul of the cosmos governs both the heavenly bodies and things on earth that affect humankind. He also accepted the Stoic Pur Tekhnikon (Creative Fire) as the substance composing the stars, gods, and everything else. There is little to indicate that Antiochus held in his cosmology the notion common to some other Platonists of transcendent immateriality; his universe, like the Stoics, is material. On the subject of fate and free will, he argues against Chrysippus (if he is in fact the philosopher identified as doing so in Cicero's De fato and Topica) by accepting the reality of free will rather than the illusion of free will created simply by the limitations of human knowledge in grasping fated future events. Antiochus' view on other beings in the cosmos, particularly the ontological status of stars and planets, may be found in his Roman student Varro who stated that the heavens, populated by souls (the immortal occupying aether and air), are divided by elements in this order from top to bottom: aether, air, water, earth.

From the highest circle of heaven to the circle of the Moon are aetherial souls, the stars and planets, and these are not only known by our intelligence to exist, but are also visible to our eyes as heavenly gods." (from Natural Theology, tr. Dillon, Middle Platonists, p. 90).

Daimons and heroes, then, were thought to occupy the aerial sphere. The importance of Antiochus for the development of Hellenistic astrology may be his break with the skepticism of the New Academy, one which allowed the Middle Platonists to espouse more theological and speculative views about the soul and the cosmos while anticipating Neoplatonic theories. In Alexandria, which, not by coincidence would become a hotbed for astrological theory and practice, Platonism incorporated strong Neopythagorean elements. Eudorus of Alexandria, who wrote a commentary on Plato's Timaeus, contributed to the importance of Timaean cosmology in middle and Neoplatonic thought. References to Eudorus' are found in Achilles' work, Introduction to Aratus' Phenemona. Achille used Eudorus as a source for this work that also contains references to Pythagorean theories of planetary harmonies. We know from Achilles that Eudorus followed the Platonic and Stoic belief that the stars are ensouled living beings (Isagoga, 13). This intellectual climate is likely the immediate context for the development of systematic astrology – with its complex classifications of the signs, planets, and their placements in a horoscope, and the numerological calculations used for predicting all sorts of events in one's life.

i. Ocellus Lucanus

The revival of Pythagoreanism by the mid-first century B.C.E. brought about the acceptance of pythagorica of "Timaeus of Locri" and Ocellus Lucanus as genuinely "early" Pre-Platonic Pythagorean texts, though both mostly like date around the second century B.C.E., or at latest, the first half of the first century B.C.E. The Neopythagorean texts just mentioned are significant for the development of Hellenistic astrology. They represent cosmological theories that likely were used as justification for astrology.

In On the Nature of the Universe (peri tês tou pantos phuseôs), Ocellus argues for a perfectly ordered harmonious universe that is immutable and unbegotten. By appealing to the empirical rationale that we cannot perceive the universe coming to be and passing away, but only its self-identity, he concludes the eternity of the whole, including its part. This whole though is divided into two worlds, the supralunary and the sublunary. The heavens down to the Moon comprise a world of unchanging harmony that governs the sublunary realm of all changing and corruptible activity. In Platonic manner, the unchanging (the Monad) governs and generates the changing (the Dyad). In Pythagorean manner, the divine beings in the unchanging realm are in perfect harmony with one another through their regular motions. Visible signs for the unchanging harmony and self-subsistence of the universe are found in the harmonious movements of things in relation to one another. Based on the nature of the relations listed - "order, symmetry, figurations (skhêmatismoi), positions (theseis), intervals (diastaseis), powers, swiftness and slowness with respect to others, their numbers and temporal periods" (1.6) - he clearly means the movements of planets and stars. This list comprises the primary factors by which astrologers would assess the strength and qualities of planets in a given horoscope as the basis for the formulation of predictive techniques and statements. For instance, swiftness of planets was thought to make them stronger while slowness (which occurs close to the retrogradation motion) weakens the planet, while "figurations" (skhêmatismoi) is a word used for aspects, or the geometrical figures planets make to one another and the ascending sign (horoskopos). Temporal periods were assigned by astrologers in a variety of ways, though usually based on the "lesser years" of the planets, the time it took for one planet to complete its revolution with respect to a starting point in the zodiac. "Intervals" (diastaseis) were measures that were calculated either between planets or between planets and the horizon or culminating points in a horoscope; in the case of the latter, the intervals were used in astrology to determine strong and weak areas in the horoscope. The former notion of intervals was used for determining various time periods of one's life assigned to each planet (cf. Valens, Anthologiarum, 3.3). "Numbers" was a term used to indicate a planet's motion (as appearing from earth) as direct or retrograde. "Powers" (dunameis) of the planets are combinations of heating, cooling, drying, moistening – these powers made planets benevolent or malevolent (cf. Ptolemy, Tetrabiblos, 1.4). Ocellus goes on to name these powers as hot, cold, wet, and dry, and he contrasts them with the "substances" (ousiai) or elements of fire, earth, water and air. The powers and substances, or "qualities" and "elements" as they are more commonly called, were used in horoscopic astrology to describe the natures of the planets and zodiac signs. In Ocellus' explanation of astral causality, the powers are immortal forms that affect changes on the sublunary substances (2.4-5).

Whether or not Ocellus and other Neopythagoreans are at the forefront of formulating these particular astrological rules, he provides a metaphysical basis for the notion that the planets and stars effect changes on earth. He is further described as saying that the Moon is the locus where immortality (above) and mortality (below) meet. He also says the obliquity of the zodiac, the pathway of the Sun, is the inclining place at which the supralunary generates activity in the sublunary realm. The Sun's seasonal motion conforms to the powers (hot, cold, wet, and dry) that bring about changes in the substances (elements); the ecliptic path inclines these powers into the realm of strife and nature.

In his discussion on the generation of men, Ocellus argues, in more of an Aristotelian than Platonic sense (as found in On Generation and Corruption, that the only participation of men in immortality is through the gift by divinities of the power of reproduction. Following rules of morality in connubial relations results in living in harmony with the universe. Immoral transgressions, though, are punished by the production of ignoble offspring. A manner of cosmic sympathy (as found in Greek medicine) plays a role in determining that the circumstances of conception (such as a tranquil state of mind) will reflect upon the nature of the offspring. This notion is in keeping with the fact that astrologers studied charts not only for the moment of birth, but for conception as well. The only major difference is that for the astrologers, the circumstances of the birth appear to be reflected universally at a given time and not the direct result of moral or immoral actions as it is for Ocellus. The moment of birth or conception for the astrologers is reflected in all things of nature and in any activities initiated at that particular moment, as reflected in the positions of the planets and signs. The technical astrologers typically did not include reflections on moral retributions in their manuals of astral fate. They were primarily concerned with detailing knowledge of fate for its own sake, though speculation about such matters as retribution and rebirth is not excluded by astrological theory.

ii. Timaeus Locrus

The Hellenistic text attributed to Timaeus Locrus, On the Nature of the World and the Soul, purports to be the original upon which Plato drew for his dialogue of his name. For the most part, it consists of a summary of the material by Plato. The circles of the Same and the Different carry the fixed stars and the planets respectively. The sphere of the fixed stars containing the cosmos is granted the Pythagorean perfect figure of the dodecahedron. One addition of note for the theory of astrology is the doctrine of the creation of souls. The four elements are made by the demiurge in equal measure and power, and Soul of man is made in the same proportion and power. Individual souls of human beings are fashioned by Nature (who has been handed the task by the demiurge of creating mortal beings) from the Sun, Moon, and planets, from the circle of Difference with a measure of the circle of the Same that she (Nature being hypostasized as the female principle) mixes in the rational part of the soul. There appears in this to be a difference in individual souls reflecting different fates based on the composition. While this merely reiterates what is found in Plato's Timaeus (42d-e), the supposition that one could read this account straight from Timaeus Locrus gave authority to these notions. It is likely that these ideas filtered to the astrologers, who would devise methods for seeking out the ruling planet (oikodespotês) for an individual (see section on Porphyry). Perhaps what they were seeking in the horoscope was one of the "young gods" whose task it was to fashion the mortal body of each soul and to steer their course away from evils. As mentioned above, some philosophers associated the young gods with the planets.

Astrological fragments of a writer "Timaeus Praxidas" date to the same period (early to middle first century B.C.E.), but there is little textual evidence to indicate that these are one and the same writer. What it at least indicates is that the legend of Timaeus lent authority to the astrological writers.

iii. Thrasyllus

Thrasyllus (d. 36 C.E.), a native of Alexandria, was not only the court astrologer to Tiberius, but a grammarian and self-professed Pythagorean who studied in Rhodes. Given that he published an edition of Plato's works (and is known for the arrangement of the dialogues into tetralogies), and that he wrote a work on Platonic and Pythagorean philosophy, we can assume that his astrological theory represents Middle Platonism of the early first century C.E. However, a summary of his astrological work "Pinax" (tables), indicates that he is drawing upon earlier sources, particularly the pseudepigrapha of "Nechepso and Petosiris" and Hermes Trismegistus. A numerological table, perhaps containing zodiac associations to numbers as that found in Teukros of Babylon, is also attributed to Thrasyllus. It appears that his own philosophy contains a mixture of Hermetic and Pythagorean elements.

A search for exact origins of astrology's development into a complex system remains inconclusive, but the following can be surmised. The combination of Pythagorean theory, such as the supralunary realm influencing the sublunar, Platonic ensouled planets moving on the circle of the Different, Stoic determinism and cosmic sympathy, and the emergence of a Hermetic tradition, comprised the intellectual context for the systematic structuring of astrology, its classifications of the signs, planets, and their placements in a horoscope, and the numerological calculations used for predicting all sorts of events in one's life.

iv. Plutarch

Besides being a prolific writer on a variety of subjects, Plutarch was, philosophically speaking, a Platonist, as defined by his era, that is, one influenced by Aristotelian, Stoic, and Neopythagorean notions. In Plutarch's case this includes ideas culled from his study of Persian and Egyptian traditions. By his time (late first century C.E.), astrology had been systematized and appropriated by Greek language and thinking, and in Rome, the political implications of astrological theory were made evident in the relationships between astrologers and emperors (such as Thrasyllus and his son Balbillus) and in the edicts against predictions about emperors (cf. Cramer, 99 ff). Plutarch's own form of Platonism did not then directly contribute to the technical development of astrology, but it does add a Middle Platonic contribution to an explanation of how astrology gained some credibility and much popularity in the first three centuries of the common era. He also borrowed some astrological concepts (and metaphors) for his own philosophy. First of all, as a priest of Apollo, Plutarch saw all other deities as symbolic aspects of One God that is invisible and unintelligible. He gained impetus for this from an etymology of "Apollo," which is explained as an alpha-privative a-pollos, or "not many" (De E apud Delphos, 393b). He resists a pure identification of the Sun with Apollo (De pythiae oraculis 400c-d), because the One God is Invisible, and the Sun an intelligible copy. He likens the Sun to one aspect, that of the Nous, the heart of the cosmos. The Moon is then associated with the cosmic Soul (and spleen), and the earth with the bowels. Taking cue from Plato's suggestion in the Laws (10.896 ff) of two world souls, beneficent and malevolent (a concept Numenius would take up later), he believed the malevolent soul to be responsible for irrational motion in the sublunary world. The malevolent or irrational soul preexisted the demiurge's creation. It is not pure evil, but the cause of evil operating in the sublunary realm, mixing with the good to create cosmic tension. Plutarch maintains the distinction of Ocellus between the generating supralunary realm and the generated sublunary realm, but he offers more detail about operations in the sublunary world of change. He posits two opposing principles or powers of good and evil that offer a right-handed straight path and a reversed, backwards path for souls (De Isis., 369e). Individual souls are microcosms of a world soul (based on Timaeus, 30b), and the parts of the soul reflect this cosmic tension. Souls are subject in the sublunary realm to a mixture of fate (heimarmenê), chance (tukhê), and free choice (eph' hêmin). The "young gods", the planetary gods in the Timaeus (42d-e) that steer souls, Plutarch designates as the province of the irrational soul. With the emphasis of the irrational soul and the mixture of forces in the sublunary realm, Plutarch's cosmology allows for the possibility of astrology. Plutarch also posits four principles (arkhê) in the cosmos, Life, Motion, Generation and Decay (De genio Socratis, 591b). Life is linked to Motion through the activity of the Invisible, through the Monad; Motion is linked to Generation through the Mind (Nous); and Generation is linked to Decay through the Soul. The three Fates (Moirai) are also linked to this cycle as Clotho seated in the Sun presided over the first process, Atropo, seated in the Moon, over the second, and Lachesis over the third on Earth (cf. De facie in orbe lunae, 945c-d). At death the soul of a person leaves the body and goes to Moon, the mind leaves the soul and goes to Sun. The reverse process happens at birth. Plutarch is not rigid with his use of planetary symbolism, for in another place, he associates the Sun with the demiurge, and the young gods with the Moon, emphasizing the rational and irrational souls (De E apud Delphos, 393a).

Plutarch's own opinion about astrology as a practice of prediction is ambiguous at best. He supported the probability of divination by human beings, although dimmed by the interference of the body, as evident in his arguments for it in On the E at Delphi (387) and in De defectu oraculorum (431e ff). However, he complains about generals who rely more heavily on divination than on counselors experienced in military affairs (Marius, 42.8). In his accounts of astrologers, his attitude appears to be more skeptical. InRomulus (12), he discusses the claims made by an astrologer named Taroutios, namely, of discovering the exact birth date and hour of Romulus as well as the time in which he lay the first stone of his city, by working backwards from his character to his birth chart. Plutarch considered astrologers' claims that cities are subject to fate accessible by a chart cast for the beginning of their foundation to be extravagant. He also wrote about how Sulla, having consulted Chaldaeans, was able to foretell his own death in his memoirs (Sulla, 37.1). However, Plutarch finds himself at a loss at explaining why Marius would be successful in his reliance on divination while Octavius was not so fortunate accepting the forecasts of Chaldaeans.

4. The Astrologers

a. The Earliest Hellenistic Astrology: Horoscopic and Katarchic

Cicero's account in On Divination of Eudoxus' rejection of Chaldaean astrological predictions points to Greek awareness of Babylonian astrology as early as the third century B.C.E. Another account about Theophrastus' awareness of Chaldaean horoscopic astrology (predicting for individuals rather than weather and general events) is given to us by Proclus (In Platonis Timaeum commentaria, 3.151). Technical manuals by Greek-speaking astrologers used for casting and interpreting horoscopic (natal) charts date as early as the late second century B.C.E. In addition to natal astrology, many of the fragments exemplify the practice of katarchical astrology, or the selection of the most auspicious moment for a given activity. Katarkhê was also used to ascertain events that had already happened, to view the course of an illness, or track down thieves, lost objects, and runaway slaves. Fragments attributed to Thrasyllus, the philosopher-astrology include such methods. This use of astrology implies that the astrologers themselves did not prescribe to strict fatalism, at least the kind that dictates that knowledge from signs of the heavens cannot influence events. Perhaps like Plutarch, they believed in a combination of fate, chance, and free will. Given the pervasiveness of cosmic sympathy and a unified cosmic order, astrology pertaining to proper moments of time and to natural occurrences was less controversial than that pertaining to the soul of human beings. However, the texts of the next few centuries focus primarily on natal rather than katarchic astrology. Methods to ascertain controversial matters such as one's length of life would proliferate and play a significant part in Roman politics (cf. Cramer, p. 58 ff). Such fascination with either the fate or predisposition of individuals reflects a stronger concern in the late Hellenistic world for the life of the individual in a period of rapid political and social change.

b. Earliest Fragments and Texts

The earliest Hermetic writings, the technical Hermetica (dated second century B.C.E. and contrasted with philosophical Hermetica cf. Fowden, p. 58) include works on astrology. As mentioned by Clement, (Stromata, 6.4.35-7), they include: on the ordering of the fixed stars, on the Sun, Moon and five planets, on the conjunctions and phases of the Sun and Moon, and on the times when the stars rise. These topics in the early Hermetica do not reflect much technical sophistication in comparison to the complicated techniques of prediction that we find in the katarchic and natal astrology texts of other astrological writers. The astronomical measurements that appear to be used for these topics are most likely for the purpose of katarchic astrology and ritual because they do not contain the apparatus for casting natal charts. An exception to the technical sparsity of astrology considered to be in the lineage of Hermes Trismegistus are the works attributed to Nechepso and Petosiris (typically dated around 150 B.C.E.), portions of which survive in quotations. Combined, they are considered a major source for many later astrologers, and are said by Firmicus Maternus to be in line with the Hermetic tradition, handed down by way of other Hermetic figures such as Aesclepius and Anubio, from Hermes himself. It is impossible to say to what extent the writers of these texts had organized existing techniques or invented new ones, but based on the frequency with which Nechepso and Petosiris are quoted by later authors, we can be certain that they were important conveyers of technical Hellenistic astrology. More about the astral theories in the later philosophical Hermeticism and Gnosticism will be discussed below.

Additional fragments are preserved of real and pseudepigraphical astrologers of the first centuries B.C.E and C.E. including Critodemus, Dorotheus of Sidon, Teukros of Babylon, (pseudo-)Eudoxus, Serapion, Orpheus, Timaeus Praxidas, Anubion, (pseudo-)Erasistratus, Thrasyllus, and Manilius. Only a few representative writers will be highlighted below.

c. Manilius

For most of the early astrological writers, we can only speculate about their theoretical justification for the practice, two exceptions being first century B.C.E. Roman Stoic Manilius, (from whom we have the Latin didactic poem, Astronomica), and Thrasyllus, whose work is described above. Manilius was also associated with the Roman imperial circle, dedicating his work to either Augustus or Tiberius (see Cramer, p. 96, for more on this controversy). While his poetic account of astrology contains much technical material, there is little evidence to show that he himself practiced astrological prediction. Some scholars speculated that he intended to avoid the political dangers of the practice in his day with the poetic writing style and the exclusion of astrological doctrine about the planets, which is necessary for the practice (or his work could simply be incomplete). His Stoic philosophy is one in which Fate is immutable, and astrology is a means of understanding the cosmic and natural order of all things, but not of changing events. However fated we are, he says, is no excuse for bad behavior such as crime, for crime is still wicked and punishable no matter what its origin in the sequence of causal determinism (4.110-117). He used the regularity of the rising of the fixed stars and the courses of the Sun and Moon as proof against the Epicureans that nothing is left to chance and that the universe is commanded by a divine will (1.483-531). Nature apportions to the stars the responsibility over the destinies of individuals (3.47-58). Nature is not thought to be separate from reason, but is the agent of Fate – one orchestrated by a material god for reasons not readily accessible to the mortals who experience apparent injustices and turns of events that defy normal expectations (4.69-86). The purpose of the deity is simply to maintain order and harmony in its cosmos (1.250-254). Astrology demonstrates cosmic sympathy among all things and can be used to predict events insofar as it grants access to the predestined order. In addition to the use of astrology for psychological acceptance of one's fate, Manilius emphasizes the aesthetic and religious benefits of its study, for he considers it a gift to mortals from the god Hermes for the sake of inducing reverence and piety of the cosmic deity.

d. Claudius Ptolemy of Alexandria

Astrology had increased in popularity in the second century C.E., and two writers of this period operating under different philosophical influences, Ptolemy (c. 100-170 C.E.) and Vettius Valens (fl. 152-162 C.E.), will next be discussed. Ptolemy is an exception among the astrological authors because first and foremost he is an empirical scientist, and one who, like his philosophical and scientific contemporaries, is concerned with theories of knowledge. His works include those on astronomy, epistemology, music, geography, optics, and astrology. He is best known as an astronomer for his work Syntaxis mathematica (Almagest), but from the middle ages to present day, his astrological work,Apotelesmatica (or Tetrabiblos as it is more commonly known), has been considered the key representative of Greek astrology, primarily due to its prominence in textual transmission.

Scholars have claimed Ptolemy's main philosophical influences to be either Peripatetic, Middle Stoic (Posidonius), Middle Platonist (Albinus) or Skeptic (sharing a possible connection with Sextus Empiricus). Any attempts to tie him to a single school would be futile. His eclecticism, though, is by no means an arbitrary amalgam of different schools, but a search for agreements (rather than disagreements sought by the Pyrrhonian Skeptics) and a scientist's harmony of rationalism and empiricism (cf. Long in Dillon & Long, p. 206-207). His epistemological criteria (in On the Criterion shows only superficial differences with the Skeptics, while he often employs Stoic terminology (such as katalêpsis) without the Stoic technical meanings. He extends the Stoic notion of oikeiôsis (as the manner of familiarity that a Stoic Sage achieves with the cosmos) to the relations of familiarity that planets and zodiac signs share among themselves.

Because Ptolemy deviates significantly from other astrologers in theory and technique, some have doubted that he was a practicing astrologer at all. It is difficult to support this claim when in theTetrabiblos he makes a long argument in favor of astrology and he claims to have better methods than offered by the tradition. It seems best to call him a "revisionist" rather than a "non-astrologer." His revisions and causal language make his position vulnerable to later attacks by Plotinus and other philosophers. The methods Ptolemy rejects include material that can be traced to the Hermetic Nechepso/Petosiris text, particularly the use of Lots (klêroi) and the division of the chart into twelve places (topoi) responsible for topics in life such as siblings, illness, travel, etc. Lots were points in the chart typically calculated from the positions of two planets and the degree of the ascending sign. He also rejects various subdivisions of the zodiac and nearly all numerologically based methods. He considered these methods to be disreputable and arbitrary because they are removed from the actual observations of planets and stars. (It might be noted here that he also rejects Pythagorean musicology on empirical grounds in his work Harmonica).

Ptolemy says, in the beginning of Book I, that the study of the relations of the planets and stars to one another (astronomy) can be used for the less perfect art of prediction based on the changes of the things they "surround" (tôn emperiekhomenon). He notes that the difficulty of the art of astrological prediction has made critics believe it to be useless, and he argues in favor of its helpfulness and usefulness. He blames bad and false practitioners for the failing of astrology. The rest of the argument involves the natural cosmic sympathy popularized by Posidonius. The influence of the Sun, Moon, and stars on natural phenomena, weather and seasons brings the possibility than men can likewise be affected in temperament due to this natural ambience (ton periekhon). The surrounding conditions of the time and place of birth contribute a factor to character and temperament (as we find earlier in Ocellus). While the supralunary movements are perfect and destined, the sublunary are imperfect, changeable, and subject to additional causes. Natural events such as weather and seasons are less complicated by additional causes than events in the lives of human beings. Rearing, custom, and culture are additional accidental causes that contribute to the destiny of an individual. He seems to encourage critics to allow astrologers to start their predictions with knowledge of these factors rather than do what is called a "cold reading" in modern astrology. The criticism he counters is that of Skeptics such as Sextus Empiricus, who elaborated on earlier arguments from the New Academy, and who argue that an astrologer does not know if they are making predictions for a human or a pack-ass (Adversus mathematicos, 5.94).

Ptolemy's arguments that astrology is useful and beneficial are the following: 1) One gains knowledge of things human and divine. This is knowledge for its own sake rather than for the purpose of gains such as wealth or fame. 2) Foreknowledge calms the soul. This is a basic argument from Stoic ethics. 3) One can see through this study that there are other causes than divine necessity. Bodies in the heavens are destined and regular, but on earth are changeable in spite of receiving "first causes" from above. This corresponds again to the Neopythagorean Platonism found in Ocellus. These first causes can override secondary causes and can subsume the fate of an individual in the cases of natural disasters. Ptolemy's attribution of the nature of planets and stars, which is the basis of their benefic or malefic nature, is that, like Ocellus before him, of heating, drying, moistening, and cooling. The stars in each sign have these qualities too based on their familiarity (oikeiôsis) with the planets. Geometrical aspects between signs, which are the basis of planetary relations, are also based on "familiarity" determined by music theory and the masculine or feminine assignment to the signs. He considers the sextile and trine aspects to be harmonious, and the quadrangle and opposition to be disharmonious.

Book 2 of Tetrabiblos includes material on astrological significations for weather, ethnology and astro-chorography. Ptolemy is not the first to delineate an astrological chorography (geographical regions assigned to signs of the zodiac), and his assignments differ significantly from those found in Dorotheus, Teukros, Manilius, and Paulus Alexandrinus. Book 3 and 4 consist of methods of prediction of various topics in natal astrology. Absent in his work is the katarchical astrology found in earlier writers. Ptolemy is the first astrologer to employ Hipparchus' zodiac modified to account for the "precession of the equinox," that is, the changing seasonal reference point against the background of the stars. This zodiac uses the vernal equinox as the beginning point rather than the beginning of one of the twelve constellations. (This "tropical" zodiac would become the standard in the Western practice of astrology up to present day. Modern opponents of astrology typically utilize precession – pointing out the fact that zodiac "signs" no longer match with the star constellations.) Other astrologers, including those shortly following Ptolemy, were either not aware of Hipparchus' observation or did not find it important to make this adjustment. Valens claims to use another method of Hipparchus, but it is debatable whether or not he adjusted his zodiac to the vernal point. Ptolemy had no impact on other astrologers of the second century, likely because his texts were not yet in circulation.

We do not find in Ptolemy's work the language of signs and astral divination, but a causal language – the relationships between the planets cause natural activity on earth, from weather to seasons to human temperament. However, Ptolemy argues for the fallibility of prediction, and cannot be considered a strict astral determinist for this reason, though he believed that astrology as a tool of knowledge could be made more accurate with improved techniques, closing the gap of fallibility. The idea that stars are causes is not original with Ptolemy, being an acceptable idea to Peripatetic thinkers cued by Aristotle's eternal circular motions of the heavens as the cause of perpetual generation (On Generation and Corruption (336b15 ff). For Ptolemy, though, this idea as a justification for the practice of astrology was probably filtered through the Peripatetic influenced Neopythagoreans such as Ocellus. Ptolemy's arguments may have been the target of subsequent attacks by Alexander of Aphrodisias, Plotinus and early Church Fathers.

e. Vettius Valens

The work Anthologiarum of Vettius Valens the Antiochian (written between 152-162 C.E.) is important for a number of reasons. It contains fragments of earlier writers such as Nechepso and Critodemus, and numerous horoscopes important for the study of the history of astronomy. He is also an astrological writer who best exemplifies the details of the practice and the mind of the practitioner. Having traveled widely in search of teachers, he exhibits techniques unavailable in other astrological texts, indicating much regional variety. Among his sources, he mentions the following astrologers and astronomers (in alphabetical order): Abram, Apollinarius, Aristarchus, Asclation, Asclepius, Critodemus, Euctemon, Hermeias, Hermes, Hermippus, Hipparchus, Hypsicles, Kidenas, Meton, Nechepso, Petosiris, Phillip, Orion, Seuthes and Soudines, Thrasyllus, Timaeus, Zoroaster. Valens claimed to have tested the methods and to have the advantage of making judgments about the methods through much toil and experience (cf. 6.9). He occasionally interjects the technical material with reflections about his philosophical convictions. His philosophical leaning is far less complicated than Ptolemy's, for it is primarily based on Stoic ethics. His association of the Sun with Nous (1.1), for example, exhibits remnants of the Neopythagorean/Middle Platonic roots (see Plutarch), but his conscious justification for astrology is based on Stoicism. That which is in our power (eph' hêmin), according to Stoic ethics, is how we adapt ourselves to fate and live in harmony with it. Valens argues that we cannot change immutable fate, but we can control how we play the role we are given (5.9). He quotes Cleanthes, Euripides, and Homer on Fate (6.9; 7.3), emphasizing that one must not stray from the appointed course of Destiny. Valens maintains a sense of "astral piety," treating astrology as a religious practice, exemplified in the oath of secrecy upon the Sun, Moon, planets and signs of the zodiac in his introduction to Book 7. He asks his reader(s) to swear not to reveal the secrets of astrology to the uneducated or the uninitiated (tois apaideutois ê amuêtois), and to pay homage to one's initial instructor, otherwise bad things will befall them. In Book 5.9, he provides a Stoic argument in favor of prognostication through astrology. He considers the outcomes that Fate decrees to be immutable, and the goddesses of Hope (Elpis) and Fortune (Tukhê) acting as helpers of necessity and enslave men with the desires created by the turns and expectations of fortune. Those however who engage with prognostication have "calmness of soul" (atarakhôn), do not care for fortune or hope, are neither afraid of death nor prone to flattery, and are "soldiers of fate" (stratiôtai tês heimarmenês). While other places, Valens gives techniques for katarchical astrology (5.3; 9.6) he states that no amount of ritual or sacrifice can alter that which is fated in one's birth chart. He also considers the time of birth to account for dissimilar natures in two children born of the same parents. In keeping with his religious approach to astrology, he treats it as "a sacred and venerable learning as something handed over to men by god so they may share in immortality." Like Ptolemy, Valens also blames the imperfections of predictions on the astrologers – particularly the inattentiveness and superficiality of some of the learners.

Ptolemy and Valens stand as representatives of astrology in the second century, but their works were not the most prominent. Astrological concepts were also used in magic, Hermeticism, Gnosticism, Gnostic Christian sects such as the Ophites, and by the author of the Chaldaean Oracles. Other known astrologers of the second century include Antiochus of Athens and Manetho (not to be confused with the Egyptian historian). One additional astrologer will be treated for his philosophical position, Firmicus Maternus. Though because he was influenced by Neoplatonic theories, he will be included below in the section on Neoplatonism.

5. The Skeptics

Already mentioned is Pliny's acceptance of some methods of astrology and rejection of others based on numerology. Similarly mentioned was Ptolemy's rejection of various methods based on subdivisions of the zodiac and manipulations based on planetary numbers. Both he and Valens, as astrologers, criticized other practitioners for either shoddy methods or deliberate deception, posing their forms of divination as astrology. Valens went so far as to admonish those who dress up their "Barbaric" teachings in calculations as though they were Greek, perhaps in reference to the frequently maligned "Chaldaeans" (Anthologiarum, 2.35). Geminus of Rhodes, an astronomer of the mid-first century B.C.E., accepts some tenets of astrology, particularly the influence of aspects "geometrical relations" of planets, while rejecting others, such as the causal influence of emanations from fixed stars. Midde Stoic Panaetius is also known to have rejected astrology, most likely under the influence of his astronomer friend Scylax, who like other astronomers of the time, attempted to set the practice of astrology apart from astronomy. Arguments against astrology can be grouped into one of two categories (though there are other ways to classify them): ones that deny the efficacy of astrology or astrologers; and ones that admit that astrology "works" but question the morality of the practice. Arguments of the latter type include those that see astrology as a type of practice of living that assumes a strict fatalism. Some of the earliest arguments against astrology were launched by the skeptical New Academy in the second century B.C.E. Arguments against astrology on moral or ethical grounds would proliferate in Christian theologians such as Origen of Alexandria and other Church Fathers. Astrology would become an important issue for Neoplatonists, with some rejecting it and others embracing it, though not within a context of strict fatalism.

a. The New Academy (Carneades)

The earliest arguments against the efficacy of astrology have been traced to the fourth head of the skeptical New Academy, Carneades (c. 213-129 B.C.E.) (cf. Cramer, p. 52-56). As an advocate of free will, primarily against Stoic determinism, Carneades is likely to have influenced other philosophers who have argued against astrology. The arguments by Carneades, who left no writings, have been reconstructed as the following:

  1. Precise astronomical observations at the moment of birth are impossible (and astrological techniques depend on such precision).
  2. Those born at the same time have different destinies (as empirically observed)
  3. Those born neither at the same time or place often share the same death time (as in the case of natural disasters)
  4. Animals born at the same time as humans (according to strict astrological fatalism) would share the same fate.
  5. The presence of diverse ethnicities, customs and cultural beliefs is incompatible with astrological fatalism.

Astrologers would respond to the last argument with the incorporation of astro-geography or astro-chorography (perhaps as early as Posidonius), indicating an astral typology of a people, and used for the purpose of "mundane" astrology, predictions for entire nations, which would also account for the second argument. Astro-chorography can be found as early as Teukros of Babylon and Manilius, but might be traced to Posidonius' predecessor Cratos of Mallos.

b. Sextus Empiricus

About three centuries later, Pyrrhonian skeptic Sextus Empiricus would elaborate upon these arguments in "Against the Astrologers" (Pros astrologous, Book 5 of Pros mathêmatikous). He first outlines the procedure of drawing a birth chart, and the basic elements of astrology, the places (topoi), the benefic and malefic nature of the planets, and the criteria for determining the power of the planets. He also notes the disagreements among astrologers, particularly regarding subdivisions of the signs, a disagreement also noted by Ptolemy. Sextus first notes typical arguments against astrology: 1) earthly things do not reallysympathize with celestial. He uses an example from anatomy, namely, the head and lower parts of body sympathize because they have unity, and this unity is lacking in celestial/earthly correspondence; 2) It is held that some events happen by necessity, some by chance, some according to our actions. If predictions are made of necessary events, then they are useless; if of chance events, then they are impossible; if of that according to our will (para hêmas), then not predetermined at all. If as he says, these are arguments by the majority, then there was an attack on the theory of cosmic sympathy and on the use of prediction (any form of divination) on events determined by any or all of the three causes. This precludes the possibility that the planets and stars are causes that determine necessity in the sublunary realm, and it presents astrology as a form of strict determinism. Sextus continues by offering a more specific set of criticisms, including the five thought to originate with Carneades. He especially focuses on the inaccuracy of instruments and measurements used for determining either the time of birth or conception. To these criticisms he adds that astrologers associate shapes and characters of men (tas morphas kai ta êthê) with the characteristics of the zodiac signs, and questions, for example, why a Lion could be associated with bravery while an equally masculine animal, the Bull, is feminine in astrology. He also ridicules physiognomic descriptions, such that those who have Virgo ascending are straight-haired, bright-eyed, white-skinned; he wonders if there are no Ethiopian Virgos. Sextus adds the argument that predictions from the alignment of planets cannot be based on empirical observation since the same configurations do not repeat for 9977 years (one calculation of the Great Year. Many such calculations exist in the Hellenistic and Late Hellenistic eras, for the exact length of the cycle was debated).

6. Hermetic and Gnostic Astrological Theories

The "philosophical" Hermetica, texts in the Hermetic tradition that are typically of later origin than the "technical" astronomical and magical fragments, share astrological imagery in common with another heterogeneous group of texts known as "Gnostic." (See more on Hermeticism and Gnosticism in Middle Platonism and Gnosticism). A factor present in both collections is the role planets and stars play in the cosmologies and eschatologies, one in which the planets and other celestial entities are seen as oppressive forces or binding powers from which the soul, by nature divine and exalted above the cosmo, must break free. Fate (Heimarmenê) plays a major role in the Hermetic texts, and astrology is sometimes taken for granted as knowledge of the Fate by which the mortal part of a human being is subjected to at birth (cf.Stobaei Hermetica, Excerpt VII). The planets are said to be subservient to Fate and Necessity, which are subordinate powers to God's providence (pronoia). In the Poimandres text, God made man in his own image, but also made a creator god (demiurge) who made seven administrators (the planets) whose government is Fate. Man being two-fold, is both immortal, and above the celestial government, and mortal, so also a slave within the system, for he shares a bit of the nature of each of the planets. At death the soul of the individual who recognizes their immortal, intellectual, and divine self ascends, while gradually surrendering the various qualities accumulated during the descent: the body is given to dissolution; the character (êthos) is yielded to the daimon (cf. Heraclitus, Fr. 119); and through each the seven planetary zones, a portion of the incarnated self that is related to the negative astrological meaning of each planet (e.g., arrogance to the Sun, greed to Jupiter) is given back to that zone. Arriving at the eighth zone, the soul is clothed in its own power (perhaps meaning its own astral body), while it is deified (in God) in the zone above the eighth (some Gnostic texts also refer to a tenth realm). Astrological fatalism, then, is modified by the Platonic immortal soul whose proper place is above the cosmic order. Astrology affects the temperament and life while in the mortal body, but not ultimately the soul. Another Hermetic text that incorporates astrology is the Secret Sermon on the Mount of Hermes to Tat (Corpus Hermeticum, Book XIII). Here the life-bearing zodiac is responsible for creating twelve torments or passions that mislead human beings. These twelve are overcome by ten powers of God, such as self-control, joy and light. In Excerpt XXIII of the Stobaei Hermetica, the zodiac is again thought responsible for giving life (to animals) while each planet contributes part of their nature to human being. In this instance, as well as in Excerpt XXIX, what the planets contribute is not all vice, but both good and bad in a way that corresponds with the nature of each planet in astrological theory. The Discourses from Hermes to Tat is a discussion of the thirty-six decans, a remnant of Egyptian religion, which was incorporated into Hellenistic astrology. The decans are guardian gods who dwell above the zodiac, and added by servants and soldiers that dwell in the aether, they affect collective events such as earthquakes, famines and political upheaval. Furthermore, the decans are said to rule over the planets and to sow good and bad daimons on earth. Although Fate is an integral part of these Hermetic writings, it seems that the transmission of the Hermetic knowledge, which intends to aid the soul to overcome Fate, is for the elect, because most men, inclining towards evil, would deny their own responsibility for evil and injustice (Excerpt VI). This is a rehashing of the Lazy Man Argument used against Stoic determinism, though cast in the light of astral fatalism.

Hippolytus, being mostly informed by Irenaeus, tells us that the Christian Marcion and his followers used Pythagorean numerology and astrology symbolism in their sect, and that they further divided the world into twelve regions using astro-geography (6.47-48). They may have used a table of astro-numerology like that found in Teukros of Babylon. Some Gnostic sects such as the Phibionites, as did the Christian Marcionites associated each degree of the zodiac with a particular god or daimon. Single degrees of the zodiac (monomoiria) were governed by each planets. The astrologers assigned each degree to a planet by various methods as outlined in the compilation of Paul of Alexandria. For the Gnostics, the degrees were hypostatized as beings that did the dirty work of the planets, who themselves are governed by higher beings on the ontological scale as produced by the Ogdoad, and Decade, and Dodecade, and ultimately leading to a cosmic ruler or demiurge, typically called Ialdabaoth, though varying based on the specific version of the cosmo-mythology of each sect. It is likely that the astrologers and the Gnostics did not use these divisions in the zodiac in the same way. Assignment of planets to divisions of the zodiac is typically used in astrology for determining the relative strength of the planets, and in the case of Critodemus (cited in Valens, 8.26), in a technique for determining length of life. The monomoiria may have been used in the Gnostic and/or Hermetic writers for the sake of gaining knowledge of the powers that oppress in order to overcome them.

In the Chaldaean Oracles, a text of the second century and thought to bear the influence of Numenius, one finds a view of the cosmos similar to that found in the Hermetic corpus. However, the divine influences from above are mediated by Hecate, who separates the divine from the earthly realm and governs Fate. Fate is a force of Nature and the irrational soul of a human being is bound to it, but the theurgic practices of bodily and mental purification, utilizing the rational soul, is preparation for the ascent through the spheres, the dwelling place of the intelligible soul and the Father God. The Oracles share with the Gnostic and Hermetic texts a hierarchy of powers including the zodiac, planets and daimons.

7. Neoplatonism and Astrology

Neoplatonism is typically thought to have originated with Plotinus; though his philosophy, like every Late Hellenistic philosophy and religion, did not develop in a vacuum. Plotinus was acquainted with the Middle Platonists Numenius and Albinus, as well as Aristotelian, Neopythagorean, Gnostic, and Stoic philosophies. Numenius (fl. 160-180 C.E.) shares with the Hermetic and Gnostic cosmologies the notion that the soul of human beings descends through the cosmos (through the Gateway of Cancer), loses memory of its divine life, and acquires its disposition from the planets. The qualities of the planets are again astrological, but vary by degree based on the distance from the intelligible realm – at the highest planetary sphere, Saturn confers reason and understanding, while at the lowest, the Moon contributes growth of the physical body. During the ascent, judges are placed at each planetary sphere; if the soul is found wanting, it returns to Hades above the waters between the Moon and Earth, then is reincarnated for ages until it is set right in virtue (based on the Myth of Er in Plato's Republic 10.614-621).

The cosmological schemes, particularly the ontological hierarchies, in Middle Platonic, Gnostic and Neopythagorean thinkers typically allows for the place of astrology, if not in a strictly deterministic way for the entire human being, for the transcendent soul descends and ascends through the cosmos and one's own actions determine future ontological status. This context places Neoplatonic philosophy in a difficult relationship with astrology and fatalism. Plotinus is unique in that he reverses the ontological status of the soul and the cosmos, for the All-Soul (World-Soul, Nous) is the creator and governor of the cosmos, but not a part of it. His philosophy, which exalts the soul above the cosmos and above the ordinance of time, forms the basis for some of his arguments against astrology.

a. Plotinus

Plotinus (204-270 C.E.) takes up the issue of astrology in Ennead 3.1 "On Fate," and in more detail in the later Ennead 2.3, "Are the Stars Causes?" (chronologically, the 52nd treatise, or third from the last). In the first text, Plotinus points out that some hold the belief that the heavenly circuit rules over everything, and the configurations of the planets and stars determine all events within this whole fated structure (3.1.2). He then elaborates upon an astrology based on Stoic cosmic sympathy theory (sumpnoia), in which animals and plants are also under sympathetic influence of the heavenly bodies, and regions of the earth are likewise influenced (3.1.5). Many astrologers divided countries into astrological zones corresponding to zodiac signs (cf. Manilius Astronomica, 4.744-817). Plotinus briefly presents the arguments that for one, this strict determinism leaves nothing up to us, and leaves us to be "rolling stones" (lithous pheromenois - this recalls the rolling cylinder example in Stoicism). Secondly, he says the influence of the parents is stronger on disposition and appearance than the stars. Thirdly, recounting the New Academy argument, he says that people born at the same time ought to share the same fate (but do not). Given this, he does argue that planets can be used for predictive purposes, because they can be used for divination like bird omens (3.1.6; 3.3.6; 2.3.7-8). The diviner, however, has no place in calling them causes since it would take a superhuman effort to unravel the series of concomitant causes in the organism of the living cosmos, in which each part participates in the whole.

In Ennead 2.3, his arguments can be divided into two types, the first being a direct assault against the specific doctrines and language used by astrologers, the second concerning the roles that the stars have on the individual soul's descent into matter, as he sees in accordance with Plato's Timaeus and Republic10. In the first set of arguments, Plotinus displays more intimate familiarity with the language of technical astrology. He turns around the perspective of this language from the observer to the view from the planets themselves. He finds it absurd, for instance, that planets affect one another when they "see" one another and that a pair of planets could have opposite affections for one another when in the region of the other (2.3.4). Another example of the switched perspective is his criticism of planetary "hairesis" doctrine, such that each planet is naturally diurnal or nocturnal and rejoices in its chosen domain. He counters that it is always day for the planets. More pertinent to his philosophy, Plotinus then poses questions about the ontological status of the planets and stars. If planets are not ensouled, they could only affect the bodily nature. If they are ensouled, their effects would be minor, not simply due to the great distance from earth, but because their effects would reach the earth as a mixture, for there are many stars and one earth (2.3.12). Plotinus does think planets are ensouled because they are gods (3.1.5). Furthermore, there are no bad planets (as astrologers claim of Mars and Saturn) because they are divine (2.3.1). They do not have in their nature a cause of evil, and do not punish human beings because we have no effect on their own happiness (2.3.2). Countering moral characteristics that astrologers attribute to the zodiac and planets, Plotinus argues that virtue is a gift from God, and vice is due to external circumstances that happen as the soul is immersed in matter (2.3.9; 2.3.14).

Plotinus does concede that just as human beings are double in nature, possessing the higher soul and the lower bodily nature, so are planets. The planets in their courses are in a better place than beings on earth, but they are not themselves completely unchanging, like beings in the realm of Intellect (2.1). In this regard he attempts to square the contribution of the stars to one's disposition in the Spindle of Fate in Plato'sRepublic 10, to his belief in free will. From the stars we get our character (êthê), characteristic actions (êthê praxeis) and emotions (pathê). He asks what is left that is "we" (hêmeis), and answers that nature gave us the power to govern (kratein) passions (pathôn) (2.3.9). If this double-natured man does not live in accordance with virtue, the life of the intellect that is above the cosmos, then "the stars do not only show him signs but he also becomes himself a part, and follows along with the whole of which he is a part" (2.3.9, tr. Armstrong).

In summary, Plotinus ridicules astrological technical doctrine for what he sees as a belief in the direct causality of the planets and stars on the fate of the individual. He also finds offensive the attribution of evil or evil-doing to the divine planets. However, he does believe that planets and stars are suited for divination because they are part of the whole body of the cosmos, and all parts are co-breathing (sumpnoia) and contribute to the harmony of the whole (2.3.7). The planets do not, then, act upon their own whims and desires.

b. Porphyry

Plotinus' best-known student, Porphyry of Tyre (c. 232/3-304/5), held quite a different view on astrology. He wrote a lost work on astrology, Introduction to Astronomy in Three Books (the word "astronomy" meaning "astrology"), and put together an Introduction to Ptolemy's Tetrabiblos (Eisagôgê eis tên Apotelesmatikên tou Ptolemaiou). In this work he heavily draws upon (and in some cases copies directly from) Antiochus of Athens, an astrologer of the late second century C.E. Antiochus' influence was considerable, and perhaps greater than Ptolemy's in the third and fourth centuries, since he was referenced by several later astrologers such as Firmicus Maternus, Hephaistion of Thebes, Rhetorius, and the medieval "Palchus." It may be that Porphyry encountered Antiochus' work when he studied in Athens under Longinus (another student of Ammonius Saccas) before continuing his Platonic education under Plotinus. Porphyry attempts to reconcile his belief in astrology with the Platonic belief in a free an exalted soul that is separable from the body. As a Pythagorean, Porphyry promoted abstinence from meat and other methods of detachment from the body as promoting virtue and a life of Nous. (cf. Launching Points to the Realm of the Mind; Letter to Marcella;On Abstinence). In an earlier work of which only fragments exist, Concerning Philosophy from Oracles, Porphyry asserts that gods and the demons use observations of the movements of stars to predict events decreed by Fate, a doctrine originating with the Stoics. He claims astrologers are sometimes incorrect in their predictions because they make faulty interpretations (while assuming that the principles of astrology itself are not false) (cf. Amand, p. 165-166; Eusebius Praeparatio evangelica, 6.1.2-5). In another fragment (Stobaeus, 2.8.39-42), Porphyry interprets Plato's Myth of Er (Republic 10.614-621) as justification for the compatibility of astrology and free choice (Amand, p. 164-165). Before the souls descend to earth, they are free to choose their guardian daimon. When on earth, they are subject to Fate and necessity based on the lot chosen. Porphyry says this is in agreement with the (Egyptian) astrologers who think that the ascending zodiac sign (hôroskopos), and the arrangement of the planets in the zodiac signify the life that was chosen by the soul (Stobaeus, 2.8.39-42). He notes, as does Plotinus (Enn., 2.3.7), that the stars are scribbling on the heavens that give signs of the future. Both Porphyry and Plotinus discuss the Myth of Er and the stars as giving divinatory signs (sêmainô), but Porphyry accepts the astrological tradition filled with complicated calculations and strange language, while Plotinus rejects it.

Porphyry's Introduction to Ptolemy's Tetrabiblos contains little content from Ptolemy, and purports to fill in the terminology and concepts that Ptolemy had taken for granted. Porphyry says that by explicating the language in as simple a way as possible, these concepts will become clear to the uninitiated. His great respect for Ptolemy is evident by his other work on the study of Ptolemy's Harmonics, and by statements that he makes of his debt, but he includes in the compilation numerous techniques that Ptolemy rejected. The debt he may be paying though, may actually be to readers of Plotinus. It may be a response to Plotinus' criticism of the language of astrology and the belief that stars are causes. Porphyry seems to think that understanding the complicated scientific language will give back the credence to astrology that the naturalistic model by Ptolemy took away (at least for his most respected teacher).

In the Letter to Anebo, Porphyry poses a series of questions about the order of and distinctions between visible and invisible Gods and daimons, and about the mantic arts. He mentions the ability of some to judge, but the configurations of the stars, whether or not divinatory predictions will be true and false, and if theurgic activity will be fruitful or in vain (Epistula ad Anebonem, 2.6c - in reference to katarchical astrology). He also asks about the symbolism of the images of the Sun that change by the hour (these figures are twelve Egyptian forms that co-rise with the ascending signs of the zodiac. The dôdekaôrai. These uneven hours were measured by the time it took for each sign to rise; cf. Greek Magical Papryi, PGM IV 1596-1715). In this work, though, he complains of Egyptian priest/astrologers such as Chaeremon, who reduce their gods to forces of nature, do not allow for incorporeals, and hold to a strict deterministic astral fatalism (Epist. Aneb., 2.13a). Porphyry concludes with questions about the practice of astrologers of finding one's own daimon, and what sort of power it imparts to us (Epist. Aneb., 2.14a-2.16a; cf. Vettius Valens, Book 3.1; Hephaistion, Apotelesmatica, 13; 20). Again, reconciling his notions of virtue and free will with astrology, he states that if it is possible to know one's daimon (indicated by the planet derived through a set of rules and designated as the oikodespotês) from the birth chart, then one can be free from Fate. He notes the difficulties and disagreements among astrologers about how to find this all-important indicator. In fact, in Introduction to Ptolemy's Tetrabiblos (30), he includes a lengthy chapter (again, borrowing from Antiochus of Athens) that explains a method for finding the oikodespotês) and for differentiating this from other ruling planets (such as the kurios and theepikratêtôr). As will be explicated, Iamblichus, who formed his own unique relationship to astrology, answered these questions in his De mysteriis.

c. Iamblichus

While Iamblichus (c. 240-325 C.E.) believed in the soul's exaltation above the cosmos, he did not, like Plotinus, think that the embodied soul of the human being is capable of rising above the cosmos and its ordering principle of Fate through simple contemplation upon the One, or the source of all things. Iamblichus responds to Porphyry's accusation that Egyptian religion is only materialistic: just as the human being is double-natured, an incorporeal soul immersed in matter, this duality is replicated at each level of being (5.20). Theurgy, for most people, should begin with the material gods that have dominion over generation and corruption of bodies. He does not think the masses are capable of intellectual means of theurgy (this is reserved for the few and for a later stage in life), but that a theurgist must start at their own level of development and individual inclinations. His complex hierarchy of beings, including celestial gods, visible gods, angels and daimons, justifies a practice of theurgy in which each of these beings is sacrificed and prayed to appropriately, in a manner pleasing to and in sympathy with their individual natures. Material means, i.e., use of stones, herbs, scents, animals, and places, are used in theurgy in a manner similar to magical practices common in the Late Hellenistic era, with the notable difference that they are used simply to please and harmonize with the order of the higher beings, rather than to obtain either an earthy or intellectual desire. Divinity pervades all things, and earthly things receive a portion of divinity from particular gods.

Answering Porphyry's question about the meaning of the Sun god seated on the Lotus (an Egyptian astrological motif), Iamblichus responds that the images that change with the zodiacal hours are symbolic of an incorporeal (and unchanging) God who is unfolded in the Light through images representing his multiple gifts. His position above the Lotus (which, being circular, represents the motion of the Intellect) indicates his transcendence over all things. Curiously, Iamblichus also says that the zodiac signs along with all celestial motions, receive their power from the Sun, placing them ontologically subordinate to it (De mysteriis, 7.3).

Next addressing Porphyry's question about astral determinism of Chaeremon (who is thought to be a first century Alexandrian astrologer/priest versed in Stoic philosophy; cf. Porphyry, De abstinentia, 4.6; Origen Contra Celsum, 1.59; Cramer, p. 116-118) and others, Iamblichus indicates that the Hermetic writings pertaining to natal astrology play a minor role in the scope of Hermetic/Egyptian philosophy (De myst., 8.4) Iamblichus does not deny the value of natal astrology, but considers it to be concerned with the lower material life, hence subordinate to the intellectual. Likewise, not all things are bound to Necessity because theurgic exercises can elevate the soul above the cosmos and above Fate (8.7). On Porphyry's question about finding one's personal daimon through astrological calculation, Iamblichus responds that the astrological calculations can say nothing about the guardian daimon. Since the natal chart is a matter concerning one's fatedness, and the daimon is assigned prior to the soul's descent (it is more ancient; presbutera) and subjection to fate, such human and fallible sciences as astrology are useless in this important matter (9.3-4). In general, Iamblichus does not show much inclination for use of astrological techniques found in Ptolemy, Antiochus, and other astrologers, but he does believe that astrology is in fact a true science, though polluted by human errors (9.4). He also accepts and uses material correspondences to celestial gods (including planets), as well as katarchical astrology, observations used for selecting the proper times (8.4).

d. Firmicus Maternus

Julius Firmicus Maternus was a fourth century Sicilian astrologer who authored an astrological work in eight books, Matheseos, and about ten years later, a Christian polemical work, On the Error of Profane Religions (De errore profanarium religionum). Unlike Augustine (who studied astrology in his youth), Firmicus did not launch polemics against astrology after his conversion to Christianity He is mentioned briefly for his Neoplatonic justification for the practice of astrology. While he claims only meager knowledge in astrology, his arguments betray a passionate commitment to a belief in astral fatalism. He treats astrological knowledge as a mystery religion, and as Vettius Valens did before him, he asks his reader, Mavortius, to take an oath of secrecy and responsibility concerning astrological knowledge. He refers to Porphyry (along with Plato and Pythagoras) as a likeminded keeper of mysteries (7.1.1). In De errore, however, he attacks Porphyry for the same reason, that he was a follower of the Serapis cult of Alexandria (Forbes' translation, p. 72). Firmicus' oath is upon the creator god (demiurge) who is responsible for the order of the cosmos and for arranging the planets as stations along the way of the souls' ascent and descent (7.1.2).

While outlining the arguments of astrology's opponents, (including the first and second arguments of the New Academy, mentioned above), Firmicus claims not to have made up his mind concerning the immortality of the soul (Matheseos, 1.1.5-6), but he shortly betrays a Platonic belief in an immortal soul separable from the body (1.3.4). These souls follow the typical Middle Platonic ascent and descent through the planetary spheres; as a variation on this theme, he holds the notion that souls descend through the sphere of the Sun and ascend through the sphere of the Moon (1.5.9). This sovereign soul is capable of true knowledge, and, by retaining an awareness in spite of its forgetful and polluted state on Earth, can know Fate imperfectly through the methods of astrology handed down from Divine Mind (mentis treated as a Latin equivalent for nous, 1.4.1-5; 1.5.11). In response to the critics, he suggests that they do not have first hand knowledge and that if they encountered false predictions, the fault lies with the fraudulent pretenders to astrology and not with the science itself (1.3.6-8). For Firmicus, the planets, as administrators of a creator God, give each individual soul their character and personality (1.5.6-7).

After offering profuse praise of Plotinus, Firmicus attacks his belief that everything is in our powers and that superior providence and reason can overcome fortune. He argues that Plotinus made this claim in the prime of his health, but that he too accepted the powers of Fate toward the end of his life, since all efforts to advert poor health, such as moving to a better climate, failed him (1.7.14-18). Following this and other examples offered to his reader of fated events, he argues against the notion held by some, that fate (heimarmenê) only controls birth and death. This argument may be a precursor of the definition of fate that Hierocles offered a century later, which will be discussed next.

e. Hierocles

Hierocles of Alexandria is a fifth century Neoplatonist who argued against astrology, particularly an astrological theory based on a Stoic view of Fate and Necessity. He also rejected magical and theurgical practices prevalent in his time as a way to either escape or overcome the fate set down in one's birth chart. His argument against these practices is based on his view of Providence and Fate, found in his work On Providence, which only survives in later summaries by ninth century Byzantine Patriarch, Photius. In general, Hierocles saw himself in line with the thinkers starting with Ammonius Saccas, who argue for the compatibility between Plato and Aristotle, while he rejects thinkers who emphasize their differences, such as Alexander of Aphrodisias. His view of Fate is that it is an immutable ordering of thinking according to divine Justice. Using, as do Plotinus and Porphyry, Plato's Myth of Er (Rep., 10), fate is a system of rewards and punishments the souls choose before reincarnation on earth. He does not, though, like Porphyry, accept the transmigration of the soul from human to animal body and vice versa. This view on reincarnation had already been put forth by Cronius, a contemporary of Numenius (cf. Dillon, p. 380). He considers astrology to be contrary to this notion of Fate because it works by a principle of "mindless necessity" (enepilogiston anagkên). Photius writes of Hierocles:

He does not at all accept the irrational "necessity" spoken of by the astrologers, nor the Stoic "force," nor even what Alexander of Aphrodisias supposed it to be, who identifies it with the nature of Platonic Bodies. Nor does he accept that one' birth can be altered by incantations and sacrifices. (Codex 214, 172b, tr. Schibli, p. 333)

The astrological theory he is arguing against is supported by Stoic fate and necessity, which assumes a chain of physical efficient causes. The astrologers who most closely represent this view are Manilius and Vettius Valens (link to above sections). There is nothing in the surviving summary to indicate that Hierocles also argues against the notion of Plotinus and Porphyry that the stars are signs rather than causes, because they are part of the rational and divine order of all things. Since he believed there is nothing outside of rational Providence, including that which is in our power (to eph' hêmin), the stars too would be a part of the rational ordering. His fate, being quite deterministic but based on moral justice, does not allow for magic and theurgic practices used to exonerate one from his Fate revealed through astrology (cf. Porphyry's Letter to Anebo; Greek Magic Papyri, XIII, 632-640). These practices he saw as unlawful attempts to manipulate or escape the ordering of things by the Providence of God.

f. Proclus

Proclus (410/11-485) was the director of the Platonic School at Athens, which called itself the "Academy" in order to maintain lineage with Plato's fourth century school. In the absence of direct statements about the astrology, Proclus' position on astral fatalism can be surmised through his philosophy, particularly his metaphysical hierarchy of beings. A paraphrase of Ptolemy's astrological work, Tetrabiblos, is attributed to him, though there is little evidence to make a substantial claim about the identity of the author/copyist. Proclus did, however, take a keen interest in astronomy, and critiqued Ptolemy's astronomical work,Syntaxis (or Almagest) in his Outline of Astronomical Hypotheses. In this work, he argues against Ptolemy's theory of precession of the equinox (Hyp. astr., 234.7-22), although other Plato/Aristotle synthesizers, such as Simplicius, accepted it along with the additional spheres the theory would entail beyond the eighth (the fixed stars).

Proclus generally proposed three levels of being - celestial, earthly, and in-between. The four elements exist at every level of being, though fire (in the form of light) predominates in the celestial realm. Celestial beings are independent, self-subsistent, divine, and have their own will and power. As ensouled beings, celestial bodies are self-moving (the Platonic notion of soul). In order to maintain a consistency with Platonic doctrine, he argued against the notion that celestial spheres are solid paths upon which the planets and stars are carried along. Rather they are places possessing latitude, longitude, and depth (bathos – a measure of proximity to earth), which are projected by the free planets as their potential course. As visible gods, he thought the planets to be intermediaries between the intelligible realm and the sensible. In terms of planets being causes, he accepts the Aristotelian notion that they cause physical changes below (due to heat and light). However, he also accepted another type of non-physical causality, more akin to cosmic sympathy, in which several causes come together to form a single effect at a proper time and place. Everything lower in the hierarchy is dependent upon the higher, and is given its proper lot (klêros) and signature (sunthêma) of the higher beings. The celestial gods also have a ruling power over lower beings (Institutio theological, 120-122). This notion of properness (epitêdeiotês) extends from the celestial realm to all things below, including plants and metals (cf. Siovanes, p. 128-129). This is much akin to astrological theory, in which each planet and sign contributes, in varying proportions, to a single effect, the individual. The planetary gods are not the only actors, for they have invisible guardians (doruphoroi - not to be confused with the planets who guard the Sun and the Moon in astrological doctrine) who populate that the space of the planets' courses, and who act as administrators. Proclus, though, is not a strict astral determinism, for as a theurgist, he also thought these allotments can be changed through theurgic knowledge (In Platonis Timaeum commentaria, 1.145).

8. Astrology and Christianity

Astrology's relationship with early Christianity has a very complex history. Prior to being established as the official religion of the Roman Empire, the attitude of Jews and Christians toward astrology varied greatly. Philo of Alexandria and various Jewish pseudepigraphical writers condemned the practice of astrology (1 Enoch, Sibylline Oracles), while other texts accept portions of it and depict biblical figures such as Abraham and Noah as astrologers (cf. Barton, Ancient Astrology, p. 68-70). As mentioned above, early Christians such as Marcion and Basilides incorporated some aspects of astrology into their belief systems. In general, though, for the earliest Christian polemicists and theologians, astrology was incompatible with the faith for a number of reasons, mostly pertaining to the immorality of its fatalism. Some of the Christian arguments against astrology were borrowed from the skeptical schools. Hippolytus of Rome (170-236 C.E.) dedicating nearly an entire book (4) of his Refutations Against All Heresies, closely followed the detailed arguments from Sextus Empiricus, particularly concerning the lack of accurate methods for discerning the time of birth, which is required for establishing the natal chart. He is particularly troubled by the associations between signs of the zodiac and physiognomical features. Hippolytus outlines a list very similar to that of Teukros of Babylon (as contained in the latter's De duodecim signis) containing correspondences between physiological and psychological characteristics; and he argues that the constellations were merely markers for star recognition, bear no resemblance to the animals by which they are named, and can bear no resemblance to human characteristics (Refutatio omnium haeresium, 4.15-27).

Bardaisan/Bardesanes (c 154-222 C.E.) was a converted Syriac Christian, who, like Augustine, studied astrology in his youth. It appears that in his conversion he did not give up all astrological thinking, for he accepts the role of the planets and stars as administrators of God. He wrote against astro-chorography, particularly the association of regions with planets based on seven climata or zones, stating that laws and customs of countries are based on institution of human free will and not on the planets. Along with free will, though, he accepts a degree of governance of nature and of chance, indicated by the limit of things in our control. Bardesanes is thought to be a forerunner of Mani, for he accepted a dualism of two world forces, dark and light (cf. Rudolf, Gnosis, p. 327-329).

Origen of Alexandria's (185-254 C.E.) relationship to astrology was equally, if not more, complex than that of Plotinus. In his Commentary on Genesis he, in a manner similar to Plotinus, offers arguments against stars as causes, but in favor of stars as signs, divine writings in the sky. These writings are available for divine powers to gain knowledge and to participate in the providential aide of human beings (Philocalia, 23.1-23.21; cf. Barton, Power and Knowledge, p. 63-64). Origen believed that all beings, celestial, human or in-between, have the role of helping all creatures attain salvation. Celestial beings play a particular role in this cosmological paideia of educating creatures toward virtue. These signs, however, are imperfect at the human level, and cannot give exact knowledge (Philocalia, 23.6). Elsewhere (De oratione, 7.1), Origen urges us to pray for the Sun, Moon and stars (rather than to them), for they are also free beings (so he surmises by interpreting Psalm 148:3) and play a unique role in the salvation of the cosmos. Quite uniquely, Origen also appears to have been one of the first philosophers (if not the first) to use the theory of precession of the equinox as an argument against astrological prediction (Philocalia, 23.18).

Origen argued against those in antiquity who interpreted the Star of Bethlehem as an astrological prediction of the birth of Christ made by the Chaldaeans. He first notes that the Magi (from Persia) are to be distinguished from Chaldaeans (a word which at the time generally referred to Babylonian astrologers or simply astrologers). Secondly, he argues that the star was unlike any other astral phenomenon they had observed, and they perceived that it represented someone (Christ) superior to any person known before, not simply by the sign of the star, but by the fact that their usual sorcery and knowledge from evil daimons had failed them (Contra Celsum, 59-60). In general, regardless of the intentions of the gospel writers of including the myth of the Star of Bethlehem, it was interpreted by Christians not as a prediction by astrological methods of divination, but as a symbol of Christ transcending the old cosmic order, particularly fate oppressing the divinely granted human free will, and replacing it with a new order (cf. Denzey, "A New Star on the Horizon," in Prayer, Magic, and the Stars, p. 207-221).

Three fourth century theologians, Gregory of Nyssa, Gregory Nazianzen, and Basil, known as the Cappadocians, rejected astrology as a part of an overall rejection of irrational Chance (Tukhê) and deterministic Necessity (Anankê) (see Pelikan, p. 154-157). Random chance had no place in the economy of God's universe, while blind necessity denies human free will. They differentiated astrology from astronomy, which was an appropriate study for admiration of creation. Unlike Origen and Plotinus, Gregory Nazianzen rejected the notion of that stars give signs for reading the future. He feared that those who interpret the biblical notion that the stars were created for giving signs (Genesis 1:14) would use this as justification for horoscopic astrology (Pelikan, p. 156).

In the Latin west, Augustine (354-430 C.E.) took up polemics against astrology in conjunction with his arguments against divination (De civitate dei, 5.1-7). His distain for astrology is related to his early exposure to it as a Manichean prior to his conversion to Christianity. In De civitate dei (City of God), he borrowed freely from Cicero's arguments against Stoic fate and divination. He particularly elaborated upon the New Academy argument that people born at the same time having different destinies (the twin argument). He includes in his attack on astrology the futility of katarchic astrology (choosing the proper moments for activities) as well as its contradiction with deterministic natal astrology. If persons are predestined by their natal charts, how can they hope to change fate by choosing the proper time for marriage, planting crops, etc? In addition, he attributes correct predictions by astrologers to occasional inspiration of evil daimons rather than the study of astrological techniques (De civ., 5.7).

As Christianity gained political and cultural ascendancy, decrees against astrology multiplied. With the closing of the "pagan" schools in 529, Neoplatonists and the astrology attached to them fled to Persia. Substantial debate exists about whether or not they set up a new school in Persia, specifically Harran, and likely, later, in Baghdad; but one thing that is certain is that astrological texts and astronomical tables (such as the Pinax of Ptolemy) used for casting charts were translated into Persian and adjusted for the sixth century. The astrological writings, particularly of Ptolemy, Dorotheus, and Vettius Valens, were then translated into Arabic and would become a part of Islamic philosophy. The Greek texts, in combination with developments in Persia and the astrology of India, would form the basis of medieval astrology. Astrology from that point on would continued its unique history, both combining with and striving against philosophical and scientific theories, up to the present day.

9. References and Further Reading

  • Amand, David. Fatalisme et Liberté dans L'Antiquité Grecqué (Lovain: Bibliothèque de L'Université, 1945)
  • Barton, Tamsyn. Ancient Astrology (London: Routledge, 1994)
  • Barton, Tamsyn. Power and Knowledge: Astrology, Physiognomics, and Medicine under the Roman Empire (Ann Arbor: University of Michigan Press, 1994)
  • Bobzien, Susanne. Determinism and Freedom in Stoic Philosophy (Oxford University Press, 1998)
  • Catalogus Codicum Astrologorum Graecorum, ed. D. Olivieri, et al., 12 Volumes (Brussels: Academie Royale, 1898-1953)
  • Cramer, Frederick H. Astrology in Roman Law and Politics (Philadelphia: American Philosophical Society, 1959)
  • Denzey, Nicola. "A New Star on the Horizon: Astral Christologies and Stellar Debates in the Early Christian Discourse," in Prayer, Magic, and the Stars, ed. Scott B Noegel (University Park, PA: Pennsylvania University Press, 2003).
  • Dillon, John. The Middle Platonists (Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press, 1977)
  • Dillon, John and A. A. Long, eds. The Question of "Eclecticism": Studies in Later Greek Philosophy(Berkeley, CA: University of California Press, 1988)
  • Edelstein, L. and I. G. Kidd, eds. Posidonius: I. The Fragments (Cambridge University Press, 1972)
  • Firmicus Maternus, The Error of the Pagan Religions, tr. Clarence A. Forbes (NY: Newman Press, 1970)
  • Firmicus Maternus. Mathesis, Vol. I and II, ed. W. Kroll and F. Skutsch (Stuttgart: Teubner, 1968)
  • Firmicus Maternus, Matheseos Libri VIII, tr. Jean Rhus Bram (Park Ridge, NJ: Noyes Press, 1975)
  • Fowden, Garth. Egyptian Hermes (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1986)
  • Green, William Chase. Moira: Fate, Good, & Evil in Greek Thought (Harper & Row, 1944)
  • Gundel, W. and Gundel, H. G. Astrologumena: die astrologische Literatur in der Antike und ihre Geschichte (Wiesbaden: Franz Steiner Verlag GMBH, 1966)
  • Holden, James Herschel. A History of Horoscopic Astrology (Tempe, AZ: American Federation of Astrologers, Inc, 1996)
  • Hunger, Hermann, and David Pingree. Astral Science in Mesopotamia (Leiden: Brill, 1999).
  • Iamblichus. On the Mysteries, tr. Thomas Taylor (San Francisco: Wizards Bookshelf, 1997)
  • Layton, Bentley, tr. and ed. The Gnostic Scriptures (New York: Doubleday, 1987).
  • Long, A. A. ed. Problems in Stoicism (London: Athlone Press, 1971).
  • Long, A. A., and D. N. Sedley. The Hellenistic Philosophers, Vol. 1 (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1987)
  • Manilius. Astronomica, tr. G. P. Goold (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1977)
  • Neugebauer, Otto. Astronomy and History: Selected Essays (New York: Springer-Verlag, 1983)
  • Pelikan, Jaroslav. Christianity and Classical Culture (New Haven, CT: Yale University Press, 1993)
  • Plutarch. Plutarchi moralia (Leipzig: Teubner, 1929-1960)
  • Claudius Ptolemy. Tetrabiblos, tr. F. E. Robbins (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1956)
  • Reiner, Erica. Astral Magic in Babylonia (Philadelphia: The American Philosophical Society, 1995)
  • Rochberg, F. Babylonian Horoscopes, trans. Amer. Philos. Soc., Vol. 99, 1 (Philadelphia, 1998)
  • Rudolf, Kurt. Gnosis: The Nature and History of Gnosticism, tr. Robert McLachlan Wilson (San Francisco, CA: Harper San Francisco, 1987)
  • Sandbach, F. H. The Stoics (London: Chatto & Windus, 1975)
  • Schibli, Hermann S. Hierocles of Alexandria (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2002).
  • Scott, Walter, ed. and tr. Hermetica Vol 1. (Boston: Shambala, 1985)
  • Sextus Empiricus. Against the Professors, Vol IV (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1949)
  • Shaw, Gregory. Theurgy and the Soul: The Neoplatonism of Iamblichus (University Park, PA: Pennsylvania State University Press, 1995)
  • Siovanes, Lucas. Proclus: Neo-Platonic Philosophy and Science (New Haven, CT: Yale University Press, 1996).
  • Stoicorum veterum fragmenta, ed. J. von Arnim (Leipzig: Teubner, 1903)
  • Vettius Valens. Anthology, ed. David Pingree (Leipzig: Teubner, 1986)

Author Information

Marilynn Lawrence
West Chester University of Pennsylvania
U. S. A.

The Stoa

The Stoa Poecile or "Painted Stoa" was a building in Athens where Zeno of Citium met his followers and taught. Later adherents of this philosophical tradition were given the name "Stoic" from their association with this place.

Table of Contents

  1. General Definition of Stoas and the Location of the Stoa Poecile
  2. History of the Use of the Stoa Poecile
  3. References and Further Reading

1. General Definition of Stoas and the Location of the Stoa Poecile

Stoas were a common feature in Greek cities and sanctuaries. Open at the front with a façade of columns, a stoa provided an open, but protected, space. In addition to providing a place for the activities of civil magistrates, shopkeepers, and others, stoas often served as galleries for art and public monuments, were used for religious purposes, and delineated public space. In the 5th century BCE the Athenian Agora had four, possibly five, stoas that lined the southern, western, and northern sides of the public area.

During excavations in the northern part of the Athenian Agora in the 1980s, archaeologists uncovered the southwestern corner of a building that is currently identified as the Stoa Poecile (for a fuller discussion of the archaeological evidence, see Camp, Archaeology of Athens, 68-69 and figures 64 and 65).

2. History of the Use of the Stoa Poecile

Originally named for Peisianax, brother-in-law of the Athenian politician Cimon, the Stoa Poecile was built at the northern end of the Athenian Agora in the 460s BCE. Made of limestone, the Stoa had a façade of Doric columns and a row of Ionic columns running down the middle to support the roof. It soon came to be popularly known as "poecile" or "painted" on account of the remarkable painted panels that adorned its back wall.

Soon after the Stoa Poecile was built, a series of panel paintings by leading artists of the day were installed. The Roman travel writer Pausanias (1.15) provides a vivid description of the appearance of these paintings in his own day, some six hundred years later. Among the mythological and historical topics portrayed were Theseus battling the Amazons, the Greeks fighting at Troy, the Athenian victory over Sparta at Oenoe near Argos (date unknown) and the Battle of Marathon (480 BCE). There were also portraits of the heroes Marathon, Theseus, Hercules, and the goddess Athena. Victory souvenirs from Athenian battles, such as the shields taken from captured Spartans at the battle of Pylos in 425 BC, also adorned the Stoa. However, the devastating invasions of the Herulians (CE 267) and the Visigoths (CE 396), along with the depradations of a greedy Roman proconsul, stripped the Stoa Poecile of its art (Synesius, Letters 54 and 135).

Scattered bits of information from antiquity testify to the variety of public uses of the Stoa Poecile. For example, juries sometimes conducted their business in the Stoa (IG II2 1641 and 1670), and public announcements were made there, such as during one of the annual celebrations of the Eleusinian Mysteries (Scholiast on Aristophanes' Frogs 369). However, the Stoa Poecile was primarily the meeting place of ordinary people, beggars, fishmongers, entertainers, and others selling their wares or merely escaping the heat of a summer's day. (Camp, Archaeology of Athens, 68-69).

When Zeno of Citium arrived in Athens around 313 BCE, he often met his followers in the Stoa Poecile and taught there. Zeno's reasons for using the Stoa Poecile are unknown, but one may speculate that the depictions of virtue - so important in Stoic ethics - in many of the paintings that adorned the building may have had some part in his decision. Zeno also appears to have taught in the Academy and Lyceum gymnasiums (Diogenes Laertius 7.1.11) and perhaps in other venues in Athens - but the name of that first meeting place became synonymous with Zeno's followers. The school itself never had a fixed locale, and later Stoic philosophers taught in gymnasia and music halls throughout Athens (Wycherley, Stones of Athens 231-233).

3. References and Further Reading

  • John M. Camp, The Archaeology of Athens (New Haven and London 2001)
  • Camp, John M. The Athenian Agora (London 1986)
  • Travalos, J. Pictorial Dictionary of Ancient Athens. Athens 1971.
  • Wycherley, R.E. The Stones of Athens. Princeton 1978.

Author Information

William Morison
Grand Valley State University


"Symposium" is the Greek term for a drinking-party. The symposium must be distinguished from the deipnon; for though drinking almost always followed a dinner-party, yet the former was regarded as entirely distinct from the latter, was regulated by different customs, and frequently received the addition of many guests who were not present at the dinner. For the Greeks did not usually drink at their dinner, and it was not until the conclusion of the meal that wine was introduced. Symposia were very frequent at Athens. Their enjoyment was heightened by agreeable conversation, by the introduction of music and dancing, and by games and amusements of various kinds; sometimes, too, philosophical subjects were discussed at them. The Symposia of Plato and Xenophon give us a lively idea of such entertainments at Athens. The name itself shows that the enjoyment of drinking was the main object of the symposia: wine from the juice of the grape (oinos ampelinos) was the only drink partaken of by the Greeks, with the exception of water. The wine was almost invariably mixed with water, and to drink it unmixed (akraton) was considered a characteristic of barbarians. The mixture was made in a large vessel called the crater, from which it was conveyed into the drinking-cups. The guests at a symposium reclined on couches, and were crowned with garlands of flowers.

Author Information

The author of this article is anonymous. The IEP is actively seeking an author who will write a replacement article.

Stilpo (c. 380—330 B.C.E.)

StilpoStilpo was a Philosopher of Megara and the most distinguished member of the Megarean school of ancient Greek philosophy. He was not only celebrated for his eloquence and skill in dialectics, but for the success with which he applied to moral precepts of philosophy to the correction of his natural propensities. Though in his youth he had been much addicted to intemperance and licentious pleasures, after he had ranked himself among philosophers he was never known to violate the laws of sobriety or chastity. With respect to riches he exercised a virtuous moderation. When Ptolemy Soter, at the taking of Megara, presented him with a large sum of money, and requested him to accompany him to Egypt, he returned the greater part of the present, and chose to retire, during Ptolemy's stay at Megara, to the island of Aegina. Afterward, when Megara was again taken by Demetrius, son of Antigonus, the conqueror ordered the soldiers to spare the house of Stilpo; and, if anything should be taken from him in the hurry of the plunder, to restore it. So great was the fame of Stilpo, that when he visited Athens, the people ran out of their shops to see him, and even the most eminent philosophers of Athens took pleasure in attending his discourses.

On moral topics Stilpo is said to have taught that the highest happiness consists in a mind free from the dominion of passion, a doctrine similar to that of the Stoics. (Diog. Laert. ii. 113-118; Sen. Epist. 9).

Author Information

The author of this article is anonymous. The IEP is actively seeking an author who will write a replacement article.

Stoic Ethics

The tremendous influence Stoicism has exerted on ethical thought from early Christianity through Immanuel Kant and into the twentieth century is rarely understood and even more rarely appreciated. Throughout history, Stoic ethical doctrines have both provoked harsh criticisms and inspired enthusiastic defenders. The Stoics defined the goal in life as living in agreement with nature. Humans, unlike all other animals, are constituted by nature to develop reason as adults, which transforms their understanding of themselves and their own true good. The Stoics held that virtue is the only real good and so is both necessary and, contrary to Aristotle, sufficient for happiness; it in no way depends on luck. The virtuous life is free of all passions, which are intrinsically disturbing and harmful to the soul, but includes appropriate emotive responses conditioned by rational understanding and the fulfillment of all one's personal, social, professional, and civic responsibilities. The Stoics believed that the person who has achieved perfect consistency in the operation of his rational faculties, the "wise man," is extremely rare, yet serves as a prescriptive ideal for all. The Stoics believed that progress toward this noble goal is both possible and vitally urgent.

Table of Contents

  1. Definition of the End
  2. Theory of Appropriation
  3. Good, Evil, and Indifferents
  4. Appropriate Acts and Perfect Acts
  5. Passions
  6. Moral Progress
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Definition of the End

Stoicism is known as a eudaimonistic theory, which means that the culmination of human endeavor or ‘end' (telos) is eudaimonia, meaning very roughly "happiness" or “flourishing.” The Stoics defined this end as “living in agreement with nature.” “Nature” is a complex and multivalent concept for the Stoics, and so their definition of the goal or final end of human striving is very rich.

The first sense of the definition is living in accordance with nature as a whole, i.e. the entire cosmos. Cosmic nature (the universe), the Stoics firmly believed, is a rationally organized and well-ordered system, and indeed coextensive with the will of Zeus, the impersonal god. Consequently, all events that occur within the universe fit within a coherent, well-structured scheme that is providential. Since there is no room for chance within this rationally ordered system, the Stoics' metaphysical determinism further dictated that this cosmic Nature is identical to fate. Thus at this level, "living in agreement with nature" means conforming one’s will with the sequence of events that are fated to occur in the rationally constituted universe, as providentially willed by Zeus.

Each type of thing within the universe has its own specific constitution and character. This second sense of ‘nature' is what we use when we say it is the nature of fire to move upward. The manner in which living things come to be, change, and perish distinguishes them from the manner in which non-living things come to be, change, and cease to be. Thus the nature of plants is quite distinct from the nature of rocks and sand. To "live in agreement with nature" in this second sense would thus include, for example, metabolic functions: taking in nutrition, growth, reproduction, and expelling waste. A plant that is successful at performing these functions is a healthy, flourishing specimen.

In addition to basic metabolism, animals have the capacities of sense-perception, desire, and locomotion. Moreover, animals have an innate impulse to care for their offspring. Thus living in agreement with a creature's animality involves more complex behaviors than those of a plant living in agreement with its nature. For an animal parent to neglect its own offspring would therefore be for it to behave contrary to its nature. The Stoics believed that compared to other animals, human beings are neither the strongest, nor the fastest, nor the best swimmers, nor able to fly. Instead, the distinct and uniquely human capacity is reason. Thus for human beings, "living in agreement with nature" means living in agreement with our special, innate endowment—the ability to reason.

2. Theory of Appropriation

The Stoics developed a sophisticated psychological theory to explain how the advent of reason fundamentally transforms the world view of human beings as they mature. This is the theory of ‘appropriation,' or oikeiôsis, a technical term which scholars have also translated variously as "orientation," “familiarization,” “affinity,” or “affiliation.” The word means the recognition of something as one’s own, as belonging to oneself. The opposite of oikeiôsis is allotriôsis, which neatly translates as “alienation.” According to the Stoic theory of appropriation, there are two different developmental stages. In the first stage, the innate, initial impulse of a living organism, plant, or animal is self-love and not pleasure, as the rival Epicureans contend. The organism is aware of its own constitution, though for plants this awareness is more primitive than it is for animals. This awareness involves the immediate recognition of its own body as “belonging to” itself. The creature is thus directed toward maintaining its constitution in its proper, i.e. its natural, condition. As a consequence, the organism is impelled to preserve itself by pursuing things that promote its own well-being and by avoiding things harmful to it. Pleasure is only a by-product of success in this activity. In the case of a human infant, for example, appropriation explains why the baby seeks his mother’s milk. But as the child matures, his constitution evolves. The child continues to love himself, but as he matures into adolescence his capacity for reason emerges and what he recognizes as his constitution, or self, is crucially transformed. Where he previously identified his constitution as his body, he begins to identify his constitution instead with his mental faculty (reason) in a certain relation to his body. In short, the self that he now loves is his rationality. Our human reason gives us an affinity with the cosmic reason, Nature, that guides the universe. The fully matured adult thus comes to identify his real self, his true good, with his completely developed, perfected rational soul. This best possible state of the rational soul is exactly what virtue is.

Whereas the first stage of the theory of appropriation gives an account of our relationship toward ourselves, the second stage explains our social relationship toward others. The Stoics observed that a parent is naturally impelled to love her own children and have concern for their welfare. Parental love is motivated by the child's intimate affinity and likeness to her. But since we possess reason in common with all (or nearly all) human beings, we identify ourselves not only with our own immediate family, but with all members of the human race—they are all fellow members of our broader rational community. In this way the Stoics meant social appropriation to constitute an explanation of the natural genesis of altruism.

3. Good, Evil, and Indifferents

The Stoics defined the good as "what is complete according to nature for a rational being qua rational being" (Cicero Fin. III.33). As explained above, the perfected nature of a rational being is precisely the perfection of reason, and the perfection of reason is virtue. The Stoics maintained, quite controversially among ancient ethical thought, that the only thing that always contributes to happiness, as its necessary and sufficient condition, is virtue. Conversely, the only thing that necessitates misery and is “bad” or “evil” is the corruption of reason, namely vice. All other things were judged neither good nor evil, but instead fell into the class of “indifferents.” They were called “indifferents” because the Stoics held that these things in themselves neither contribute to nor detract from a happy life. Indifferents neither benefit nor harm since they can be used well and badly.

However, within the class of indifferents the Stoics distinguished the "preferred" from the “dispreferred.” (A third subclass contains the ‘absolute' indifferents, e.g. whether the number of hairs on one’s head is odd or even, whether to bend or extend one’s finger.) Preferred indifferents are “according to nature.” Dispreferred indifferents are “contrary to nature.” This is because possession or use of the preferred indifferents usually promotes the natural condition of a person, and so selecting them is usually commended by reason. The preferred indifferents include life, health, pleasure, beauty, strength, wealth, good reputation, and noble birth. The dispreferred indifferents include death, disease, pain, ugliness, weakness, poverty, low repute, and ignoble birth. While it is usually appropriate to avoid the dispreferred indifferents, in unusual circumstances it may be virtuous to select them rather than avoid them. The virtue or vice of the agent is thus determined not by the possession of an indifferent, but rather by how it is used or selected. It is the virtuous use of indifferents that makes a life happy, the vicious use that makes it unhappy.

The Stoics elaborated a detailed taxonomy of virtue, dividing virtue into four main types: wisdom, justice, courage, and moderation. Wisdom is subdivided into good sense, good calculation, quick-wittedness, discretion, and resourcefulness. Justice is subdivided into piety, honesty, equity, and fair dealing. Courage is subdivided into endurance, confidence, high-mindedness, cheerfulness, and industriousness. Moderation is subdivided into good discipline, seemliness, modesty, and self-control. Similarly, the Stoics divide vice into foolishness, injustice, cowardice, intemperance, and the rest. The Stoics further maintained that the virtues are inter-entailing and constitute a unity: to have one is to have them all. They held that the same virtuous mind is wise, just, courageous, and moderate. Thus, the virtuous person is disposed in a certain way with respect to each of the individual virtues. To support their doctrine of the unity of virtue, the Stoics offered an analogy: just as someone is both a poet and an orator and a general but is still one individual, so too the virtues are unified but apply to different spheres of action.

4. Appropriate Acts and Perfect Acts

Once a human being has developed reason, his function is to perform "appropriate acts" or “proper functions.” The Stoics defined an appropriate act as “that which reason persuades one to do” or “that which when done admits of reasonable justification.” Maintaining one's health is given as an example. Since health is neither good nor bad in itself, but rather is capable of being used well or badly, opting to maintain one’s health by, say, walking, must harmonize with all other actions the agent performs. Similarly, sacrificing one’s property is an example of an act that is only appropriate under certain circumstances. The performance of appropriate acts is only a necessary and not a sufficient condition of virtuous action. This is because the agent must have the correct understanding of the actions he performs. Specifically, his selections and rejections must form a continuous series of actions that is consistent with all of the virtues simultaneously. Each and every deed represents the totality and harmony of his moral integrity. The vast majority of people are non-virtuous because though they may follow reason correctly in honoring their parents, for example, they fail to conform to ‘the laws of life as a whole’ by acting appropriately with respect to all of the other virtues.

The scale of actions from vicious to virtuous can be laid out as follows: (1) Actions done "against the appropriate act," which include neglecting one's parents, not treating friends kindly, not behaving patriotically, and squandering one’s wealth in the wrong circumstances; (2) Intermediate appropriate actions in which the agent’s disposition is not suitably consistent, and so would not count as virtuous, although the action itself approximates proper conduct. Examples include honoring one’s parents, siblings, and country, socializing with friends, and sacrificing one’s wealth in the right circumstances; (3) “Perfect acts” performed in the right way by the agent with an absolutely rational, consistent, and formally perfect disposition. This perfect disposition is virtue.

5. Passions

As we have seen, only virtue is good and choiceworthy, and only its opposite, vice, is bad and to be avoided according to Stoic ethics. The vast majority of people fail to understand this. Ordinary people habitually and wrongly judge various objects and events to be good and bad that are in fact indifferent. The disposition to make a judgment disobedient to reason is the psychic disturbance the Stoics called passion (pathos). Since passion is an impulse (a movement of the soul) which is excessive and contrary to reason, it is irrational and contrary to nature. The four general types of passion are distress, fear, appetite, and pleasure. Distress and pleasure pertain to present objects, fear and appetite to future objects. The following table illustrates their relations.

Table of Four Passions (pathê)

Present Object
Future Object
Irrationally judged to be good
Irrationally judged to be bad

Distress is an irrational contraction of the soul variously described as malice, envy, jealousy, pity, grief, worry, sorrow, annoyance, vexation, or anguish. Fear, an irrational shrinking of the soul, is expectation of something bad; hesitation, agony, shock, shame, panic, superstition, dread, and terror are classified under it. Appetite is an irrational stretching or swelling of the soul reaching for an expected good; it is also called want, yearning, hatred, quarrelsomeness, anger, wrath, intense sexual craving, or spiritedness. Pleasure is an irrational elation over what seems to be worth choosing; it includes rejoicing at another's misfortunes, enchantment, self-gratification, and rapture.

The soul of the virtuous person, in contrast, is possessed of three good states or affective responses (eupatheiai). The three ‘good states' of the soul are joy (chara), caution (eulabeia), and wish (boulêsis). Joy, the opposite of pleasure, is a reasonable elation; enjoyment, good spirits, and tranquility are classed under it. Caution, the opposite of fear, is a reasonable avoidance. Respect and sanctity are subtypes of caution. Wish, the opposite of appetite, is a reasonable striving also described as good will, kindliness, acceptance, or contentment. There is no "good feeling" counterpart to the passion of distress.

Table of Three Good States

Present Object
Future Object
Rationally judged to be good
Rationally judged to be bad

For example, the virtuous person experiences joy in the company of a friend, but recognizes that the presence of the friend is not itself a real good as virtue is, but only preferred. That is to say the company of the friend is to be sought so long as doing so in no way involves any vicious acts like a dereliction of his responsibilities to others. The friend's absence does not hurt the soul of the virtuous person, only vice does. The vicious person’s soul, in contrast, is gripped by the passion of pleasure in the presence of, say, riches. When the wealth is lost, this irrational judgment will be replaced by the corresponding irrational judgment that poverty is really bad, thus making the vicious person miserable. Consequently, the virtuous person wishes to see his friend only if in the course of events it is good to happen. His wish is thus made with reservation (hupexhairesis): "I wish to see my friend if it is fated, if Zeus wills it." If the event does not occur, then the virtuous person is not thwarted, and as a result he is not disappointed or unhappy. His wish is rational and in agreement with nature, both in the sense of being obedient to reason (which is distinctive of our human constitution) and in the sense of harmonizing with the series of events in the world.

The virtuous person is not passionless in the sense of being unfeeling like a statue. Rather, he mindfully distinguishes what makes a difference to his happiness—virtue and vice—from what does not. This firm and consistent understanding keeps the ups and downs of his life from spinning into the psychic disturbances or "pathologies" the Stoics understood passions to be.

6. Moral Progress

The early Stoics were fond of uncompromising dichotomies—all who are not wise are fools, all who are not free are slaves, all who are not virtuous are vicious, etc. The later Stoics distinguished within the class of fools between those making progress and those who are not. Although the wise man or sage was said to be rarer than the phoenix, it is useful to see the concept of the wise man functioning as a prescriptive ideal at which all can aim. This ideal is thus not an impossibly high target, its pursuit sheer futility. Rather, all who are not wise have the rational resources to persevere in their journey toward this ideal. Stoic teachers could employ this exalted image as a pedagogical device to exhort their students to exert constant effort to improve themselves and not lapse into complacency. The Stoics were convinced that as one approached this goal, one came closer to real and certain happiness.

7. References and Further Reading

  • Becker, Lawrence C. 1998. A New Stoicism. Princeton: Princeton University Press.
    • A daring exposition of what Stoic philosophy would look like today if it had enjoyed a continuous development through the Renaissance, the Enlightenment, modern science, and the fads of twentieth century moral philosophy.
  • Brennan, Tad. 2003. "Stoic Moral Psychology," in Brad Inwood, ed., The Cambridge Companion to the Stoics, 257-294.
  • Cooper, John. 1989. "Greek Philosophers on Euthanasia and Suicide," in Brody, B.A. ed., Suicide and Euthanasia. Dordrecht, 9-38.
  • Inwood, Brad and Donini, Pierluigi. 1999. "Stoic ethics," in Algra, Keimpe, et al. eds. The Cambridge History of Hellenistic Philosophy. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 675-738.
    • A detailed treatment of the subject.
  • Long, A. A. 1986. Hellenistic Philosophy: Stoics, Epicureans, Sceptics. 2nd ed. Berkeley and Los Angeles: University of California Press.
    • A very readable introduction to the three Hellenistic schools.
  • Long, A. A. and D. N. Sedley. 1987. The Hellenistic Philosophers, Volume 1. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
    • Readings from the main schools: Epicureanism, Stoicism, Scepticism, and the Academics. Includes commentaries on the readings. This is the standard primary source text.
  • Schofield, Malcolm. "Stoic Ethics," in Brad Inwood, ed., The Cambridge Companion to the Stoics, 233-256.
    • A fine overview that argues that Zeno (founder of the Stoa) systematized the Socratic and Cynic philosophies. Two different types of projects in Stoic ethics are identified: (1) laying out the definitions and divisions of the key concepts in discursive ethical discourse, and (2) trying to explain and establish by argument the Stoic view on key ethical subjects.
  • Sorabji, Richard. 2000. Emotion and Peace of Mind: From Stoic Agitation to Christian Temptation. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • A meticulous study of Stoic moral psychology and much more.

Author Information

William O. Stephens
Creighton University
U. S. A.

Ancient Greek Skepticism

Although all skeptics in some way cast doubt on our ability to gain knowledge of the world, the term "skeptic" actually covers a wide range of attitudes and positions. There are skeptical elements in the views of many Greek philosophers, but the term "ancient skeptic" is generally applied either to a member of Plato's Academy during its skeptical period (c. 273 B.C.E to 1st century B.C.E.) or to a follower of Pyrrho (c. 365 to 270 B.C.E.). Pyrrhonian skepticism flourished from Aenesidemus' revival (1st century B.C.E.) to Sextus Empiricus, who lived sometime in the 2nd or 3rd centuries C.E. Thus the two main varieties of ancient skepticism: Academic and Pyrrhonian.

The term "skeptic" derives from a Greek noun, skepsis, which means examination, inquiry, consideration. What leads most skeptics to begin to examine and then eventually to be at a loss as to what one should believe, if anything, is the fact of widespread and seemingly endless disagreement regarding issues of fundamental importance. Many of the arguments of the ancient skeptics were developed in response to the positive views of their contemporaries, especially the Stoics and Epicureans, but these arguments have been highly influential for subsequent philosophers and will continue to be of great interest as long as there is widespread disagreement regarding important philosophical issues.

Nearly every variety of ancient skepticism includes a thesis about our epistemic limitations and a thesis about suspending judgment. The two most frequently made objections to skepticism target these theses. The first is that the skeptic's commitment to our epistemic limitations is inconsistent. He cannot consistently claim to know, for example, that knowledge is not possible; neither can he consistently claim that we should suspend judgment regarding all matters insofar as this claim is itself a judgment. Either such claims will refute themselves, since they fall under their own scope, or the skeptic will have to make an apparently arbitrary exemption. The second sort of objection is that the alleged epistemic limitations and/or the suggestion that we should suspend judgment would make life unlivable. For, the business of day-to-day life requires that we make choices and this requires making judgments. Similarly, one might point out that our apparent success in interacting with the world and each other entails that we must know some things. Some responses by ancient skeptics to these objections are considered in the following discussion.

(Hankinson [1995] is a comprehensive and detailed examination of ancient skeptical views. See Schmitt [1972] and Popkin [1979] for discussion of the historical impact of ancient skepticism, beginning with its rediscovery in the 16th Century, and Fogelin [1994] for an assessment of Pyrrhonian skepticism in light of contemporary epistemology. The differences between ancient and modern forms of skepticism has been a controversial topic in recent years-see especially, Annas [1986], [1996], Burnyeat [1984], and Bett [1993].)

Table of Contents

  1. Academic vs. Pyrrhonian Skepticism
  2. Academic Skepticism
    1. Arcesilaus
      1. Platonic Innovator
      2. Attack on the Stoics
      3. On Suspending Judgment
      4. Dialectical Interpretation
      5. Practical Criterion: to Eulogon
    2. Carneades
      1. Socratic Dialectic
      2. On Ethical Theory
      3. On the Stoic Sage
      4. On Epistemology
      5. Practical Criterion: to Pithanon
      6. Dialectical Skeptic or Fallibilist?
    3. Philo and Antiochus
    4. Cicero
  3. Pyrrhonian Skepticism
    1. Pyrrho and Timon
    2. Aenesidemus
      1. Revival of Pyrrhonism
      2. The Ten Modes
      3. Tranquility
    3. Sextus Empiricus
      1. General Account of Skepticism
      2. The Path to Skepticism
      3. The Modes of Agrippa
      4. Skepticism vs. Relativism
      5. The Skeptical Life
  4. Skepticism and the Examined Life
  5. Greek and Latin Texts, Commentaries, and Translations
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Academic vs. Pyrrhonian Skepticism

The distinction between Academic and Pyrrhonian skepticism continues to be a controversial topic. In the Second Century C.E., the Roman author Aulus Gellius already refers to this as an old question treated by many Greek writers (Attic Nights 11.5.6, see Striker [1981/1996]). The biggest obstacle to correctly making this distinction is that it is misleading to describe Academic and Pyrrhonian skepticism as distinctly unified views in the first place since different Academics and Pyrrhonists seem to have understood their skepticisms in different ways. So even though the terms Academic and Pyrrhonian are appropriate insofar as there are clear lines of transmission and development of skeptical views that unify each, we should not expect to find a simple account of the distinction between the two.

2. Academic Skepticism

a. Arcesilaus

Following Plato's death in 347 B.C.E., his nephew Speusippus became head of the Academy. Next in line were Xenocrates, Polemo and Crates. The efforts of the Academics during this period were largely directed towards developing an orthodox Platonic metaphysics. When Crates died (c. 272 B.C.E.) Arcesilaus of Pitane (c. 318 to 243 B.C.E.) became the sixth head of the Academy. Another member of the Academy, Socratides, who was apparently in line for the position, stepped down in favor of Arcesilaus (Diogenes Laertius [DL] 4.32); so it seems he was held in high regard by his predecessors, at least at the time of his appointment. (See Long [1986] for discussion of the life of Arcesilaus.)

i. Platonic Innovator

According to Diogenes Laertius, Arcesilaus was "the first to argue on both sides of a question, and the first to meddle with the traditional Platonic system [or: discourse, logos] and by means of question and answer, to make it more of a debating contest" (4.28, translation after R.D. Hicks).

Diogenes is certainly wrong about Arcesilaus being the first to argue on both sides of a question. This was a long standing practice in Greek rhetoric commonly attributed to the Sophists. But Arcesilaus wasresponsible for turning Plato's Academy to a form of skepticism. This transition was probably supported by an innovative reading of Plato's books, which he possessed and held in high regard (DL 4.31).

Diogenes' remark that Arcesilaus "meddled" with Plato's system and made it more of a debating contest indicates a critical attitude towards his innovations. Diogenes (or his source) apparently thought that Arcesilaus betrayed the spirit of Platonic philosophy by turning it to skepticism.

Cicero, on the other hand, in an approving tone, reports that Arcesilaus revived the practice of Socrates, which he takes to be the same as Plato's.

"[Socrates] was in the habit of drawing forth the opinions of those with whom he was arguing, in order to state his own view as a response to their answers. This practice was not kept up by his successors; but Arcesilaus revived it and prescribed that those who wanted to listen to him should not ask him questions but state their own opinions. When they had done so, he argued against them. But his listeners, so far as they could, would defend their own opinion" (de Finibus 2.2, translated by Long and Sedley, 68J, see also de Natura Deorum 1.11).

Arcesilaus had (selectively) derived the lesson from Plato's dialogues that nothing can be known with certainty, either by the senses or by the mind (de Oratore 3.67, on the topic of Plato and Socrates as proto-skeptics, see Annas [1992], Shields [1994] and Woodruff [1986]). He even refused to accept this conclusion; thus he did not claim to know that nothing could be known (Academica 45).

ii. Attack on the Stoics

In general, the Stoics were the ideal target for the skeptics; for, their confidence in the areas of metaphysics, ethics and epistemology was supported by an elaborate and sophisticated set of arguments. And, the stronger the justification of some theory, the more impressive is its skeptical refutation. They were also an attractive target due to their prominence in the Hellenistic world. Arcesilaus especially targeted the founder of Stoicism, Zeno, for refutation. Zeno confidently claimed not only that knowledge is possible but that he had a correct account of what knowledge is, and he was willing to teach this to others. The foundation of this account is the notion of katalêpsis: a mental grasping of a sense impression that guarantees the truth of what is grasped. If one assents to the proposition associated with a kataleptic impression, i.e. if one experiences katalepsis, then the associated proposition cannot fail to be true. The Stoic sage, as the perfection and fulfillment of human nature, is the one who assents only to kataleptic impressions and thus is infallible.

Arcesilaus argued against the possibility of there being any sense-impressions which we could not be mistaken about. In doing so, he paved the way for future Academic attacks on Stoicism. To summarize the attack: for any sense-impression S, received by some observer A, of some existing object O, and which is a precise representation of O, we can imagine circumstances in which there is another sense-impression S', which comes either (i) from something other than O, or (ii) from something non-existent, and which is such that S' is indistinguishable from S to A. The first possibility (i) is illustrated by cases of indistinguishable twins, eggs, statues or imprints in wax made by the same ring (Lucullus 84-87). The second possibility (ii) is illustrated by the illusions of dreams and madness (Lucullus 88-91). On the strength of these examples, Arcesilaus apparently concluded that we may, in principle, be deceived about any sense-impression, and consequently that the Stoic account of empirical knowledge fails. For the Stoics were thorough-going empiricists and believed that sense-impressions lie at the foundation of all of our knowledge. So if we could not be certain of ever having grasped any sense-impression, then we cannot be certain of any of the more complex impressions of the world, including what strikes us as valuable. Thus, along with the failure to establish the possibility of katalepsis goes the failure to establish the possibility of Stoic wisdom (see Hankinson [1995], Annas [1990] and Frede [1983/1987] for detailed discussions of this epistemological debate).

iii. On Suspending Judgment

In response to this lack of knowledge (whether limited to the Stoic variety or knowledge in general), Arcesilaus claimed that we should suspend judgment. By arguing for and against every position that came up in discussion he presented equally weighty reasons on both sides of the issue and made it easier to accept neither side (Academica 45). Diogenes counts the suspension of judgment as another of Arcesilaus' innovations (DL 4.28) and refers to this as the reason he never wrote any books (4.32). Sextus Empiricus (Outlines of Pyrrhonism [generally referred to by the initials of the title in Greek, PH] 1.232) and Plutarch (Adversus Colotes 1120C) also attribute the suspension of judgment about everything to him.

Determining precisely what cognitive attitude Arcesilaus intended by "suspending judgment" is difficult, primarily because we only have second and third hand reports of his views (if indeed he endorsed any views, see Dialectical Interpretation below). To suspend judgment seems to mean not to accept a proposition as true, i.e. not to believe it. It follows that if one suspends judgment regarding p, then he should neither believe that p nor should he believe that not-p (for this will commit him to the truth of not-p). But if believing p just means believing that p is true, then suspending judgment regarding everything is the same as not believing anything. If Arcesilaus endorsed this, then he could not consistently believe either that nothing can be known or that one should consequently suspend judgment.

iv. Dialectical Interpretation

One way around this problem is to adopt the dialectical interpretation (advanced by Couissin [1929]). According to this interpretation, Arcesilaus merely showed the Stoics that they didn't have an adequate account of knowledge, not that knowledge in general is impossible. In other words, knowledge will only turn out to be impossible if we define it as the Stoics do. Furthermore, he did not show that everyone should suspend judgment, but rather only those who accept certain Stoic premises. In particular, he argued that if we accept the Stoic view that the Sage never errs, and since katalepsis is not possible, then the Sage (and the rest of us insofar as we emulate the Sage) should never give our assent to anything. Thus the only way to achieve sagehood, i.e. to consistently avoid error, is to suspend judgment regarding everything and never risk being wrong (Lucullus 66-67, 76-78, see also Sextus Empiricus, Against the Logicians [generally referred to by the initial M, for the name of the larger work from which it comes,Adversus Mathematikos] 7.150-57). But the dialectical Arcesilaus himself neither agrees nor disagrees with this.

v. Practical Criterion: to Eulogon

The biggest obstacle to the dialectical interpretation is Arcesilaus' practical criterion, to eulogon. Arcesilaus presented this criterion in response to the Stoic objection that if we were to suspend judgment regarding everything, then we would not be able to continue to engage in day to day activities. For, theStoics thought, any deliberate action presupposes some assent, which is to say that belief is necessary for action. Thus if we eliminate belief we will eliminate action (Plutarch, Adversus Colotes 1122A-F, LS 69A).

Sextus remarks that

inasmuch as it was necessary . . . to investigate also the conduct of life, which cannot, naturally, be directed without a criterion, upon which happiness-that is, the end of life-depends for its assurance, Arcesilaus asserts that he who suspends judgment about everything will regulate his inclinations and aversion and his actions in general by the rule of "the reasonable [to eulogon]," and by proceeding in accordance with this criterion he will act rightly; for happiness is attained by means of wisdom, and wisdom consists in right actions, and the right action is that which, when performed, possesses a reasonable justification. He, therefore, who attends to "the reasonable" will act rightly and be happy (M 7.158, translated by Bury).

There is a good deal of Stoic technical terminology in this passage, including the term eulogon itself, and this may seem to support the dialectical interpretation. On this view, Arcesilaus is simply showing the Stoics both that their account of knowledge is not necessary for virtue, and that they nonetheless already have a perfectly acceptable epistemic substitute, to eulogon (see Striker [1980/1996]). But this raises the question, why would Arcesilaus make such a gift to his Stoic adversaries? It would be as if, Maconi's words, "Arcesilaus first knocked his opponent to the ground and then gave him a hand up again" (1988: 248). Such generosity would seem to be incompatible with the purely dialectical purpose of refutation. Similarly, if he had been arguing dialectically all along, there seems to be no good reason for him to respond to Stoic objections, for he was not presenting his own views in the first place. On the other hand, the proponent of the dialectical view could maintain that Arcesilaus has not done any favors to the Stoics by giving them the gift of to eulogon; rather, this "gift" may still be seen as a refutation of the Stoic view that a robust knowledge is necessary for virtue.

An alternative to the dialectical view is to interpret to eulogon as Arcesilaus' own considered opinion regarding how one may live well in the absence of certainty. This view then encounters the earlier difficulty of explaining how it is consistent for Arcesilaus to endorse suspending judgment on all matters while at the same time believing that one may attain wisdom and happiness by adhering to his practical criterion.

b. Carneades

Arcesilaus was succeeded by Lacydes (c. 243 B.C.E.), and then Evander and Hegesinus in turn took over as heads of the Academy. Following Hegesinus, Carneades of Cyrene (c. 213 to 129 B.C.E.), perhaps the most illustrious of the skeptical Academics, took charge. Rather than merely responding to the dogmatic positions that were currently held as Arcesilaus did, Carneades developed a wider array of skeptical arguments against any possible dogmatic position, including some that were not being defended. He also elaborated a more detailed practical criterion, to pithanon. As was the case with Arcesilaus, he left nothing in writing, except for a few letters, which are no longer extant (DL 4.65).

i. Socratic Dialectic

Carneades employed the same dialectical strategies as Arcesilaus (Academica 45, Lucullus 16), and similarly found his inspiration and model in Plato's Socrates. The Socratic practice which Carneades employed, according to Cicero, was to try to conceal his own private opinion, relieve others from deception and in every discussion to look for the most probable solution (Tusculan Disputations 5.11, see also de Natura Deorum 1.11).

In 155 B.C.E., nearly one hundred years after Arcesilaus' death in 243, Carneades is reported to have gone as an Athenian ambassador to Rome. There he presented arguments one day in favor of justice and the next he presented arguments against it. He did this not because he thought that justice should be disparaged but rather to show its defenders that they had no conclusive support for their view (Lactantius, LS 68M). Similarly, we find Carneades arguing against the Stoic conception of the gods, not in order to show that they do not exist, but rather to show that the Stoics had not firmly established anything regarding the divine (de Natura Deorum 3.43-44, see also 1.4). It seems then that Carneades was motivated primarily by the Socratic goal of relieving others of the false pretense to knowledge or wisdom and that he pursued this goal dialectically by arguing both for and against philosophical positions.

ii. On Ethical Theory

But whereas Arcesilaus seemed to limit his targets to positions actually held by his interlocutors, Carneades generalized his skeptical attack, at least in ethics and epistemology. The main task of Hellenistic ethics was to determine the summum bonum, the goal at which all of our actions must aim if we are to live good, happy lives. Carneades listed all of the defensible candidates, including some that had not actually been defended, in order to argue for and against each one and show that no one in fact knows what the summum bonum is, if indeed there is one (de Finibus 5.16-21). He may have even intended the stronger conclusion that it is not possible to acquire knowledge of the summum bonum,assuming his list was exhaustive of all the serious candidates.

iii. On the Stoic Sage

As with Arcesilaus, Carneades also focused much of his skeptical energy on the Stoics, particularly the views of the scholarch Chrysippus (DL 4.62). The Stoics had developed a detailed view of wisdom as life in accordance with nature. The Stoic sage never errs, he never incorrectly values the goods of fortune, he never suffers from pathological emotions, and he always remains tranquil. His happiness is completely inviolable since everything he does and everything he experiences is precisely as it should be; and crucially, he knows this to be true. Even though the Stoics were extremely reluctant to admit that anyone had so far achieved this extraordinary virtue, they nonetheless insisted that it was a real possibility (Luc.145, Tusc. 2.51, Seneca Ep. 42.1, M 9.133, DL 7.91).

As a dialectician, Carneades carefully examined this conception of the sage. Sometimes he argued, contrary to the Stoic view, that the sage would in fact assent to non-kataleptic impressions and thus that he was liable to error (Luc. 67); for he might form opinions even in the absence of katalepsis (Luc. 78). But he also apparently argued against the view that the sage will hold mere opinions in the absence of katalepsis (Luc. 112). Presumably he didn't himself endorse either position since the issue that had to be decided first was whether katalepsis was even possible. In other words, if certainty is possible, then of course the sage should not settle for mere opinion. But if it is not possible, then perhaps he will be entitled to hold mere opinions, provided they are thoroughly examined and considered.

iv. On Epistemology

Just as Carneades generalized his skeptical attack on ethical theories, he also argued against all of his predecessors' epistemological theories (M 7.159). The main task of Hellenistic epistemology was to determine the criterion (standard, measure or test) of truth. If the criterion of truth is taken to be a sort of sense-impression, as in the Stoic theory, then we will not be able to discover any such impression that could not in principle appear true to the most expertly trained and sensitive perceiver and yet still be false (M 7.161-65, see Arcesilaus' "Attack on the Stoics" above). But if we can discover no criterial sense-impression, then neither will the faculty of reason alone be able to provide us with a criterion, insofar as we accept the empiricist view (common among Hellenistic philosophers) that nothing can be judged by the mind that hasn't first entered by the senses.

We have no evidence to suggest that Carneades also argued against a rationalist, or a priori approach to the criterion.

v. Practical Criterion: to Pithanon

According to Sextus, after arguing against all the available epistemological theories, Carneades himself needed to advance a criterion for the conduct of life and the attainment of happiness (M 7.166). Sextus does not tell us why it was necessary for Carneades to do so, but it was probably for the same reason that Arcesilaus had presented his practical criterion-namely, in response to the objection that if there were no epistemic grounds on which to prefer one impression over another then, despite all appearances, we cannot rationally govern our choices. Thus, Carneades expounded his practical criterion, to pithanon.

First he noted that every sense impression exists in two distinct relations: one relative to the object from which it comes, the "impressor", and the other relative to the perceiver. The first relation determines what we ordinarily think of as truth: does the impression correspond to its object or not? The second relation determines plausibility: is the impression convincing to the perceiver or not? Rather than relying on the first relation, Carneades adopted the convincing impression [pithanê phantasia] as the criterion of truth, even though there will be occasions on which it fails to accurately represent its object. Yet, he apparently thought that these occasions are rare and so they do not provide a good reason for distrusting the convincing impressions. For such impressions are reliable for the most part, and in actual practice, life is regulated by what holds for the most part (M 7.166-75, LS 69D).

Sextus also reports the refinements Carneades made to his criterion. If we are considering whether we should accept some impression as true, we presumably have already found it to be convincing, but we should also consider how well it coheres with other relevant impressions and then thoroughly examine it further as if we were cross-examining a witness. The amount of examination that a convincing impression requires is a function of its importance to us. In insignificant matters we make use of the merely convincing impression, but in weighty matters, especially those having to do with happiness, we should only rely on the convincing impressions that have been thoroughly explored (M 7.176-84).

Cicero translates Carneades' pithanon with the Latin terms probabile and veri simile, and he claims that this criterion is to be employed both in everyday life and in the Academic dialectical practice of arguing for and against philosophical views (Luc. 32, see also Contr.Ac. 2.26, and Glucker [1995]). The novel feature of this criterion is that it does not guarantee that whatever is in accordance with it is true. But if it is to play the dialectical role explicitly specified by Cicero and suggested by Sextus' report, then it must have some connection with truth. This is especially clear in the case of sense-impressions: the benefit of thoroughly examining sense-impressions is that we may rule out the deceptive ones and accept the accurate ones. And we may make a similar case, as Cicero does, for the dialectical examination of philosophical views. A major difficulty in interpreting Carneades' pithanon in this way is that it requires some explanation for how we are able to identify what resembles the truth (veri simile) without being able to identify the truth itself (Luc. 32-33).

vi. Dialectical Skeptic or Fallibilist?

Even if the fallibilist interpretation of Carneades' criterion is correct, it remains a further issue whether he actually endorsed his criterion himself, or whether he merely developed it dialectically as a possible view. Indeed, even Carneades' student Clitomachus was unable to determine what, if anything, Carneades endorsed (Luc. 139, see also Striker [1980/1996]). A number of difficulties arise if he did endorse his criterion. First, Carneades argued that there is absolutely no criterion of truth (M 7.159) and that would presumably include to pithanon. Second, Clitomachus claims that Carneades endured a nearly Herculean labor "when he cast assent out of our minds, like a wild and savage beast, that is mere opinion and thoughtlessness" (Luc. 108). Thus it would seem to be inconsistent for him to accept a moderate, fallible form of assent if it leads to holding opinions.

We may more simply deal with Carneades' criterion by noting that sometimes he argued so zealously in support of some view that people reasonably, but incorrectly, assumed that he accepted it himself (Luc.78, Fin. 5.20). Thus we may say that Carneades only advanced views dialectically but remained uncommitted to any of them. His criterion in this case would be the disappointing consequence of Stoic epistemological commitments-disappointing (as in the case with the dialectical reading of Arcesilaus'eulogon) because the Stoics believed these same commitments led to a much more robust criterion.

On the other hand, Cicero endorses a fallibilist interpretation of to pithanon which he seems to think was also endorsed by Carneades himself. This interpretation was developed by another of Carneades' students, Metrodorus, and by Cicero's teacher, Philo. We also have evidence that Carneades made an important distinction between assent and approval that he may have appealed to in this context (Luc. 104, see Bett [1990]). He limits assent to the mental event of taking a proposition to be true and adopts the term "approval" for the more modest mental event of taking a proposition to be convincing but without making any commitment to its truth. If this distinction is viable it would allow Carneades to approve of his epistemological criterion without committing himself at any deeper theoretical level. In other words Carneades could appeal to his criterion for his very adoption of that criterion: it is pithanon but not certain that to pithanon is the criterion for determining what we should approve of. Cicero claims that Carneades made just this sort of move in the case of his rejection of the possibility of Stoic katalepsis: it isprobabile (= pithanon), but not certain, that katalepsis is not possible (Luc. 110, see Thorsrud [2002]).

c. Philo and Antiochus

According to Sextus Empiricus, most people divide the Academy into three periods: the first, the so-called Old Academy, is Plato's; the second is the Middle Academy of Arcesilaus; and the third is the New Academy of Carneades. But, he remarks, some also add a fourth Academy, that of Philo, and a fifth Academy, Antiochus' (PH 1.220). Philo was head of the Academy from about 110 to 79 B.C.E. His interpretation of Academic skepticism as a mitigated form that permits tentative approval of the view that survives the most dialectical scrutiny is recorded and examined in Cicero's Academica, and in the earlier version of this dialogue, the Lucullus. The Lucullus is just one of the two books that constituted the earlier version. The second book, now lost was called Catulus, after one of the main speakers. Cicero later revised these books, dividing them into four; but only part of the first of those four, what is usually referred to as the Academica posteriora, has survived. Nevertheless, we have enough of these books to get a pretty good sense of the whole work (see Griffin [1997], Mansfeld [1997]).

Philo apparently claimed that some sense-impressions very well may be true but that we nonetheless have no reliable way to determine which ones these are (Luc. 111, see also 34). Similarly, Sextus attributes to Philo the view that "as far the Stoic standard (i.e. apprehensive appearance [= kataleptic impression]) is concerned, objects are inapprehensible, but as far as the nature of the objects themselves is concerned they are apprehensible" (PH 1.235, translated by Annas and Barnes). He may have made these remarks in order to underwrite the Academic practice of accepting certain views as resembling the truth; for there must be some truth in the first place-even if we don't have access to it-in order for something to resemble it.

Under the pressure of Stoic objections to his fallibilist epistemology Philo apparently made some controversial innovations in Academic philosophy. Cicero refers to these innovations but doesn't discuss them in any detail (Luc. 11-12), nor did he accept them himself, preferring Philo's earlier view of the Academy and the dialectical practices of Carneades. Philo's innovation may have been to commit himself to the metaphysical claim that some impressions are indeed true by providing arguments to that effect. So rather than rely on the likelihood that some impressions are true he may have sought to establish this more firmly. He then may have lowered the standard for knowledge by giving up the internalist requirement that one be able to identify which impressions are true and adopted instead the externalist position that just having true impressions, as long as they have the right causal history, is enough for one to have knowledge (see Hankinson [1997] for this interpretation, see also Tarrant [1985] and Brittain [2001]).

After Philo, Antiochus (c. 130 to c. 68 B.C.E.) led the Academy decidedly back to a form of dogmatism. He claimed that the Stoics and Peripatetics had more accurately understood Plato and thus he sought to revive these views, including primarily Stoic epistemology and ethics, in his Academy (Cicero examines Antiochus' views in de Finibus 5. Glucker [1978] is a groundbreaking study of Antiochus.).

d. Cicero

Cicero was a lifelong student and practitioner of Academic philosophy and his philosophical dialogues are among the richest sources of information about the skeptical Academy. Although he claims to be a mere reporter of other philosophers' views (Att. 12.52.3), he went to some trouble in arranging these views in dialogue form and most importantly in supplying his own words to express them. In some cases he coined the words he needed thereby teaching philosophy to speak Latin. His philosophical coinages-e.g.essentia, qualitas, beatitudo-have left a lasting imprint on Western philosophy.

He is generally not considered to be an original thinker but it is difficult to determine the extent to which this is true since practically none of the books he relied on have survived and so we do not know how much, or whether, he modified the views he presented. Nevertheless, despite questions of originality, his dialogues express a humane and intelligent view of life. Plutarch, in his biography, claims that Cicero often asked his friends to call him a philosopher because he had chosen philosophy as his work, but merely used oratory to achieve his political ends (Life of Cicero 32.6, Colish [1985] is a comprehensive survey of Cicero's philosophical dialogues, so too MacKendrick [1989], and see Powell [1995] for more recent essays on Cicero's philosophy).

3. Pyrrhonian Skepticism

Pyrrho of Elis (c. 360 to c. 270 BCE), the founder of Pyrrhonian skepticism, is a shadowy figure who wrote nothing himself. What little we know of him comes, for the most part, from fragments of his pupil Timon's poems and from Diogenes Laertius' biography (9.61-108) which is based on a book by Antigonus of Carystus, an associate of Timon. There seem to have been no more disciples of Pyrrho after Timon, but much later in the 1st Century B.C.E., Aenesidemus proposed a skeptical view that he claimed to be Pyrrhonian. Later still in the 2nd Century C.E., Sextus Empiricus recorded a battery of skeptical arguments aimed at all contemporary philosophical views. As with Aenesidemus, Sextus claimed Pyrrho as the founder, or at least inspiration, for the skepticism he reports. The content of these skeptical views, the nature of Pyrrho's influence, and the relations between succeeding stages of Pyrrhonism are controversial topics.

a. Pyrrho and Timon

The anecdotal evidence for Pyrrho tends to be sensational. Diogenes reports, for example, that Pyrrho mistrusted his senses to such an extent that he would have fallen off cliffs or been run over by carts and savaged by dogs had his friends not followed close by (9.62). He was allegedly indifferent to certain norms of social behavior, taking animals to market, washing a pig and even cleaning the house himself (9.66). For the most part we find his indifference presented as a positive characteristic. For example, while on a ship in the midst of a terrible storm he was able to maintain a state of tranquility (9.68). Similarly, Timon presents Pyrrho as having reached a godlike state of calm, having escaped servitude to mere opinion (9.64-5, see also the fragments of Timon's prose works, as recorded by Aristocles, LS 2A and 2B). He was also held in such high regard by his native city that he was appointed as high priest and for his sake they made all philosophers exempt from taxation (9.64). We also find a tantalizing report of a journey to India where Pyrrho mingled with, and presumably learned from, certain naked sophists and magi (9.61, the connection with Indian Buddhism is explored by Flintoff [1980]).

Generally, the anecdotal evidence in Diogenes, and elsewhere, is unreliable, or at least highly suspect. Such reports are more likely colorful inventions of later authors attributed to Pyrrho to illustrate, or caricature, some part of his philosophical view. Nevertheless, he is consistently portrayed as being remarkably calm due to his lack of opinion, so we may cautiously accept such accounts.

The most important testimony to the nature of Pyrrho's skepticism comes from Aristocles, a Peripatetic philosopher of the 2nd Century C.E.:

It is supremely necessary to investigate our own capacity for knowledge. For if we are so constituted that we know nothing, there is no need to continue enquiry into other things. Among the ancients too there have been people who made this pronouncement, and Aristotle has argued against them. Pyrrho of Elis was also a powerful spokesman of such a position. He himself has left nothing in writing, but his pupil Timon says that whoever wants to be happy must consider these three questions: first, how are things by nature? Secondly, what attitude should we adopt towards them? Thirdly, what will be the outcome for those who have this attitude? According to Timon, Pyrrho declared that [1] things are equally indifferent, unmeasurable and inarbitrable. For this reason [2] neither our sensations nor our opinions tell us truths or falsehoods. Therefore, for this reason we should not put our trust in them one bit, but we should be unopinionated, uncommitted and unwavering, saying concerning each individual thing that it no more is than is not, or it both is and is not, or it neither is nor is not. [3] The outcome for those who actually adopt this attitude, says Timon, will be first speechlessness, and then freedom from disturbance . . . (Aristocles apudEusebius, Praeparatio evangelica 14.18.1-5, translated by Long and Sedley, 1F).

Let us consider Pyrrho's questions and answers in order. First, what are things like by nature? This sounds like a straightforward metaphysical question about the way the world is, independent of our perceptions. If so, we should expect Pyrrho's answer, [1] that things are equally indifferent, unmeasurable and inarbitrable, to be a metaphysical statement. But this will lead to difficulties, for how can Pyrrho arrive at the apparently definite proclamation that things are indefinite? That is, doesn't his metaphysical statement refute itself by implicitly telling us that things are decidedly indeterminate? If we take this view we may defend Pyrrho by allowing his claim to be exempt from its own scope-so we can determine only this much: every property of every thing is indeterminate (see Bett [2000] for this defense). Alternatively, we may allow Pyrrho to embrace the apparent inconsistency and assert that his claim is itself neither true nor false, but is inarbitrable. The former option seems preferable insofar as the latter leaves Pyrrho with no definite assertion whatsoever and it thus becomes unclear how he could draw the inferences he does from [1] to [2].

On the other hand, we may seek to avoid these difficulties by interpreting Pyrrho's first answer as epistemological. After all, the predicates he uses suggest an epistemological claim is being made. And further, Aristocles introduces this passage by noting that we must investigate our capacity for knowledge and he claims that Pyrrho was a spokesman for the view that we know nothing. Bett [2000] argues against the epistemological reading on the grounds that it doesn't make good sense of the passage as it stands. For if we assume the epistemological reading of [1], that we are unable to determine the natures of things, then it would be pointless to infer from that that [2] our senses lie. It would make much more sense to reverse the inference: one might reasonably argue that our senses lie and thus we are unable to determine the natures of things. Some have proposed emending the text from "for this reason (dia touto)" to "on account of the fact that (dia to)" to capture this reversal of the inference. But if we read the text as it stands, we may still explain Aristocles' epistemological focus by pointing out that if [1] things are indeterminate, then the epistemological skepticism will be a consequence: things are indeterminable.

Second, in what way ought we to be disposed towards things? Since things are indeterminate (assuming the metaphysical reading) then no assertion will be true, but neither will any assertion be false. So we should not have any opinion about the truth or falsity of any statement (with the exception perhaps of these meta-level skeptical assertions). Instead, we should only say and think that something no more is than is not, or both is and is not, or neither is nor is not, because in fact that's the way things are. So for example, having accepted [1] (and assuming the predicative reading of "is" in [2]), I will no longer believe that this book is red, but neither will I believe that it is not red. The book is no more red than not-red, or similarly, it is as much red as not-red.

Third, what will be the result for those who are so disposed? The first result is speechlessness (literally, not saying anything)-but this is odd given that we are encouraged to adopt a form of speech in [2]. Perhaps speechlessness follows after initially saying only that things are no more this than that, etc.; then finally, freedom from disturbance follows. Presumably, the recognition that things are no more to be sought after than not sought after is instrumental in producing tranquility, for if nothing is intrinsically good or bad, we have no reason to ever be distressed, or to be exuberantly joyful. But then it seems we would not be able to even choose one thing over another. Pyrrho's tranquility thus begins to look like a kind of paralysis and this is probably what prompted some of the sensational anecdotes.

Diogenes notes, however, that according to Aenesidemus, Pyrrho exercised foresight in his day-to-day activities, and that he lived to be ninety (9.62). So it seems his tranquility did not paralyze him after all. This may be either because Pyrrho (or Timon) was disingenuous about what he was up to intellectually, or more charitably because he followed appearances (9.106) without ever committing himself to the truth or falsity of what appeared. (See "Sextus on the skeptical life" below for further discussion).

b. Aenesidemus

We know practically nothing about Aenesidemus except that he lived sometime in the 1st Century B.C.E., and that he dedicated one of his written works to a Lucius Tubero, a friend of Cicero's who was also a member of the Academy. This has led most scholars to suppose that Aenesidemus was a member of the Academy, probably during the period of Philo's leadership, and that his revival of Pyrrhonian skepticism was probably a reaction to Philo's tendency towards fallibilism. Although this is plausible, it makes the fact that Cicero never mentions him quite puzzling.

i. Revival of Pyrrhonism

Aenesidemus' Pyrrhonian Discourses (Pyrrhoneia), like the rest of his works, have not survived, but they are summarized by a ninth century Byzantine patriarch, Photius, who is remarkable in his own right. In his Bibliothêkê (Bib.), he summarized 280 books, including the Pyrrhoneia, apparently from memory. It is clear from his summary that he thinks very little of Aenesidemus' work. This is due to his view that Aenesidemus' skepticism makes no contribution to Christian dogma and drives from our minds the instinctive tenets of faith (Bib. 170b39-40). Nevertheless, a comparison of his summaries with the original texts that have survived reveal that Photius is a generally reliable source (Wilson [1994]). So despite his assessment of Aenesidemus' skepticism, the consensus is that he provides an accurate summary of thePyrrhoneia. The proper interpretation of that summary, however, is disputed.

Aenesidemus was a member of Plato's Academy, apparently during the period of Philo's leadership. Growing dissatisfied with what he considered the dogmatism of the Academy, he sought to revitalize skepticism by moving back to a purer form inspired by Pyrrho. His specific complaint against his contemporary Academics was that they confidently affirm some things, even Stoic beliefs, and unambiguously deny other things. In other words, the Academics, in Aenesidemus' view, were insufficiently impressed by our epistemic limitations.

His alternative was to "determine nothing," not even the claim that he determines nothing. Instead, the Pyrrhonist says that things are no more one way than another. This form of speech is ambiguous (in a positive sense, from Aenesidemus' perspective) since it neither denies nor asserts anything unconditionally. In other words, the Pyrrhonist will only assert that some property belongs to some object relative to some observer or relative to some set of circumstances. Thus, he will conditionally affirm some things but he will absolutely deny that any property belongs to anything in every possible circumstance. This seems to be what Aenesidemus meant by "determining nothing," for his relativized assertions say nothing definite about the nature of the object in question. Such statements take the form: it is not the case that X is by nature F. This is a simple denial that X is always and invariably F, though of course X may be F in some cases. But such statements are importantly different from those of the form: X is by nature not-F. For these sorts of statements affirm that X is invariably not-F and that there can be no cases of X that exhibit the property F. The only acceptable form of expression for Aenesidemus then seems to be statements that may sometimes be false (See Woddruff [1988] for this interpretation, also Bett 2000).

ii. The Ten Modes

The kinds of conclusion that Aenesidemus countenanced as a Pyrrhonist can more clearly be seen by considering the kinds of arguments he advanced to reach them. He apparently produced a set of skeptical argument forms, or modes, for the purpose of refuting dogmatic claims regarding the natures of things. Sextus Empiricus discusses one such group, the Ten Modes, in some detail (PH 1.35-163, M 7.345, see also Diogenes Laertius' account of the Ten Modes at 9.79-88, and the partial account in Philo of Alexandria, On Drunkenness 169-205, and see Annas and Barnes [1985] for detailed and critical discussion of all ten modes).

The first mode is designed to show that it is not reasonable to suppose that the way the world appears to us humans is more accurate than the incompatible ways it appears to other animals. This will force us to suspend judgment on the question of how these things are by nature, in and of themselves, insofar as we have no rational grounds on which to prefer our appearances and insofar as we are not willing to accept that something can have incompatible properties by nature. If, for example, manure appears repulsive to humans and delightful to dogs, weare unable to say that it really is, in its nature, either repulsive or delightful, or both repulsive and delightful. It is no more delightful than not-delightful, and no more repulsive than not-repulsive, (again, in its nature).

Just as the world appears in incompatible ways to members of different species, so too does it appear incompatibly to members of the same species. Thus, the second mode targets the endless disagreements among dogmatists. But once again, we will find no rational ground to prefer our own view of things, for if an interested party makes himself judge, we should be suspicious of the judgment he reaches, and not accept it.

The third mode continues the line of reasoning developed in the first two. Just as the world appears in incompatible ways to different people, it also appears incompatibly to the different senses of one and the same person. So, for example, painted objects seem to have spatial dimensions that are not revealed to our sense of touch. Similarly, perfume is pleasant to the nose but disgusting to the tongue. Thus, perfume is no more pleasant than not-pleasant.

The fourth mode shows that differences in the emotional or physical state of the perceiver affects his perception of the world. Being in love, calm and warm, one will experience the cold wind that comes in with his beloved quite differently than if he is angry and cold. We are unable to adjudicate between these incompatible experiences of the cold wind because we have no rational grounds on which to prefer our experience in one set of circumstances to our experience in another. One might say that we should give preference to the experiences of those who are healthy, sane and calm as that is our natural state. But in response, we may employ the second mode to challenge the notion of a single, healthy condition that is universally applicable.

The fifth mode shows that differences in location and position of an observed object relative to the observer will greatly affect the way the object appears. Here we find the oar that appears bent in water, the round tower that appears square from a distance, and the pigeon's neck that changes color as the pigeon moves. These features are independent of the observer in a way that the first four modes are not. But similar to the first four, in each case we are left without any rational grounds on which to prefer some particular location or position over another. Why should we suppose, for example, that the pigeon's neck is really green rather than blue? And if we should propose some proof, or theory, in support of it being really blue, we will have to face the skeptic's demand for further justification of that theory, which will set off an infinite regress.

The sixth mode claims that nothing can be experienced in its simple purity but is always experienced as mixed together with other things, either internally in its composition or externally in the medium in which it is perceived. This being the case, we are unable to ever experience the nature of things, and thus are unable to ever say what that nature is.

The seventh mode appeals to the way different effects are produced by altering the quantity and proportions of things. For example, too much wine is debilitating but the right amount is fortifying. Similarly, a pile of sand appears smooth, but individual grains appear rough. Thus, we are led to conclude that wine is no more debilitating than fortifying and sand is no more smooth than rough, in their natures.

The eighth mode, from relativity, is a paradigm for the whole set of modes. It seeks to show, in general, that something appears to have the property F only relative to certain features of the perceiving subject or relative to certain features of the object. And, once again, insofar as we are unable to prefer one set of circumstances to another with respect to the nature of the object, we must suspend judgment about those natures.

The ninth modes points out that the frequency of encountering a thing affects the way that thing appears to us. If we see something that we believe to be rare it will appear more valuable. And when we encounter some beautiful thing for the first time it will seem more beautiful or striking than it appears after we become familiar with it. Thus, we must conclude, for example, that a diamond is no more valuable than worthless.

Finally, the tenth mode, which bears on ethics, appeals to differences in customs and law, and in general, to differences in the ways we evaluate the world. For some, homosexuality is acceptable and good, and to others it is unacceptable and bad. In and of itself, homosexuality is neither good nor bad, but only relative to some way of evaluating the world. And again, since we are unable to prefer one set of values to another, we are led to the conclusion that we must suspend judgment, this time with respect to the intrinsic value of things.

In each of these modes, Aenesidemus seems to be advancing a sort of relativism: we may only say that some object X has property F relative to some observer or set of circumstances, and not absolutely. Thus his skepticism is directed exclusively at a version of Essentialism; in this case, the view that some object has property F in any and every circumstance. A further question is whether Aenesidemus intends his attack on Essentialism to be ontological or epistemological. If it is epistemological, then he is claiming that we simply cannot know what the nature or essence of some thing is, or even whether it has one. This seems most likely to have been Aenesidemus' position since Photius' summary begins with the remark that the overall aim of the Pyrrhoneia is to show that there is no firm basis for cognition. Similarly, the modes seem to be exclusively epistemological insofar as they compel us to suspend judgment; they are clearly designed to force the recognition that no perspective can be rationally preferred to any other with respect to real natures, or essences. By contrast, the ontological view that there are no essences, is not compatible with suspending judgment on the question.

iii. Tranquility

We do not have enough evidence to determine precisely why Aenesidemus found inspiration in Pyrrho. One important point, however, is that they both promote a connection between tranquility and an acceptance of our epistemic limitations (see Bett [2000] for an elaboration of this view). Diogenes Laertius attributes the view to both Anesidemus and the followers of Timon that as a result of suspending judgment, freedom from disturbance (ataraxia) will follow as a shadow (DL 9.107-8). Similarly, Photius reports Aenesidemus' view that those who follow the philosophy of Pyrrho will be happy, whereas by contrast, the dogmatists will wear themselves out in futile and ceaseless theorizing (Bib. 169b12-30, LS 71C). Although there seem to be important differences in what Pyrrho and Aenesidemus understood by our epistemic limitations, they both promoted tranquility as the goal, or at least end product. In general terms the idea is clear enough: the way to a happy, tranquil existence is to live in accordance with how things seem, including especially our evaluative impressions of the world. Rather than trying to uncover some hidden reality, we should accept our limitations, operate in accordance with custom and habit, and not be disturbed by what we cannot know (see Striker [1990/1996]).

c. Sextus Empiricus

We know very little about Sextus Empiricus, aside from the fact that he was a physician. He may have been alive as early as the 2nd Century C.E. or as late as the 3rd Century C.E. We cannot be certain as to where he lived, or where he practiced medicine, or where he taught, if indeed he did teach. In addition to his philosophical books, he also wrote some medical treatises (referred to at M 7.202, 1.61) which are no longer extant.

There are three philosophical works that have survived. Two of these works are grouped together under the general heading, Adversus Mathematikos-which may be translated as Against the Learned, or Against the Professors, i.e. those who profess to know something worth teaching. This grouping is potentially misleading as the first group of six books (chapters, by current standards) are complete and form a self-contained whole. In fact Sextus refers to them with the title Skeptical Treatises. Each of these books target some specific subject in which people profess to be experts, thus: grammar, rhetoric, mathematics, geometry, astrology and music. These are referred to as M 1 through 6, respectively.

There are five additional books in the second set grouped under the heading Adversus Mathematikos:two books containing arguments against the Logicians (M 7, 8), two books against the Physicists (M 9, 10), and one book against the Ethicists (M 11). This set of books is apparently incomplete since the opening of M 7 refers back to a general outline of skepticism that is in none of the extant books of M.

The third work is the Outlines of Pyrrhonism, in three books. The first book provides an outline summary of Pyrrhonian skepticism and would correspond to the missing portion of M. Books 2 and 3 provide arguments against the Logicians, Physicists and Ethicists, corresponding to M 7 through 11. The discussion in PH tends to be much more concise and carefully worded, though there is greater detail and development of many of the same arguments in M. The nature of the relation between these three works is much disputed, especially since the view presented in PH seems to be incompatible with large portions of M (see Bett [1997]).

The following discussion is limited to the views presented in PH.

i. General Account of Skepticism

Sextus begins his overview of Pyrrhonian skepticism by distinguishing three fundamental types of philosopher: dogmatists, who believe they have discovered the truth; Academics (negative dogmatists), who believe the truth cannot be discovered; and skeptics, who continue to investigate, believing neither that anyone has so far discovered the truth nor that it is impossible to do so. Although his characterization of Academics is probably polemical and unfair, the general distinctions he makes are important.

Sextus understands the skeptic, at least nominally as Pyrrho and Aenesidemus do, as one who by suspending judgment determines nothing, and enjoys tranquility as a result. But, as we will see, his conception of suspending judgment is considerably different from his predecessors'.

ii. The Path to Skepticism

According to Sextus, one does not start out as a skeptic, but rather stumbles on to it. Initially, one becomes troubled by the kinds of disagreements focused on in Aenesidemus' modes and seeks to determine which appearances accurately represent the world and which explanations accurately reveal the causal histories of events. The motivation for figuring things out, Sextus asserts, is to become tranquil, i.e. to remove the disturbance that results from confronting incompatible views of the world. As the proto-skeptic attempts to sort out the evidence and discover the privileged perspectiveor the correct theory, he finds that for each account that purports to establish something true about the world there is another, equally convincing account, that purports to establish an opposed and incompatible view of the same thing. Being faced with this equipollence, he is unable to assent to either of the opposed accounts and thereby suspends judgment. This, of course, is not what he set out to do. But by virtue of his intellectual integrity, he is simply not able to arrive at a conclusion and so he finds himself without any definite view. What he also finds is that the tranquility that he originally thought would come only by arriving at the truth, follows upon his suspended judgment as a shadow follows a body.

Sextus provides a vivid story to illustrate this process. A certain painter, Apelles, was trying to represent foam on the mouth of the horse he was painting. But each time he applied the paint he failed to get the desired effect. Growing frustrated, he flung the sponge, on which he had been wiping off the paint, at the picture, inadvertently producing the effect he had been struggling to achieve (PH 1.28-29). The analogous point in the case of seeking the truth is that the desired tranquility only comes indirectly, not by giving up the pursuit of truth, but rather by giving up the expectation that we must acquire truth to get tranquility. It is a strikingly Zen-like point: one cannot intentionally acquire a peaceful, tranquil state but must let it happen as a result of giving up the struggle. But again, giving up the struggle for the skeptic does not mean giving up the pursuit of truth. The skeptic continues to investigate in order to protect himself against the deceptions and seductions of reason that lead to our holding definite views.

Arriving at definite views is not merely a matter of intellectual dishonesty, Sextus thinks; more importantly, it is the main source of all psychological disturbance. For those who believe that things are good or bad by nature, are perpetually troubled. When they lack what they believe to be good their lives must seem seriously deficient if not outright miserable, and they struggle as much as possible to acquire those things. But when they finally have what they believe to be good, they spend untold effort in maintaining and preserving those things and live in fear of losing them (PH 1.27).

Sextus' diagnosis is not limited to evaluative beliefs, however. This is clear by virtue of the fact that he provides extensive arguments against physical and logical (broadly speaking, scientific and epistemological) theories also. How, then, do such beliefs contribute to the psychological disturbances that Sextus seeks to eliminate? The most plausible reply is that any such belief that we find Sextus arguing against in PH is one that will inevitably contribute to one's evaluations of the world and thus will contribute to the intense strivings that characterize disturbance. An examination of a sample of the logical and physical theses that Sextus' discusses bears this out. Many of these beliefs played foundational roles in the Epicurean or Stoic systems, and thus were employed to establish ethical and evaluative beliefs. Believing that the physical world is composed of invisible atoms, for example, would not, by itself, produce any disturbance since we must draw inferences from this belief in order for it to have any significance for us with respect to choice and avoidance. So it is more appropriate to look past the disturbance that may be produced by individual, isolated beliefs, and consider instead the effect of accepting a system of interrelated, mutually supporting dogmatic claims.

iii. The Modes of Agrippa

As a supplement to the Ten Modes of Aenesidemus (as well as his Eight Modes aimed at causal explanations, see PH 1.180-85, and Hankinson [1998]), Sextus offers a set of Five Modes (PH 1.164-77) and Two Modes (PH 1.178-79) employed by "more recent skeptics." We may gather from Diogenes (9.88) that the more recent skeptic referred to is Agrippa. It is important to point out that Sextus merely reports these modes, he does not endorse them at a theoretical level. That is, he does not claim that they possess any sort of logical standing, e.g. that they are guaranteed to reveal a flaw in dogmatic positions, or that they represent some ideal form of reasoning. Instead, we should think of these modes as part of the general account of skepticism, with which the skeptic's practice coheres (PH 1.16-17). In other words, these modes simply describe the way Sextus and his fellow skeptics behave dialectically.

Agrippa's Five Modes relies on the prevalence of dispute and repeats the main theme of Aenesidemus' Modes: we are frequently faced with dissenting opinions regarding the same matter and yet we have no adequate grounds on which to prefer one view over another. Should a dogmatist offer an account of such grounds, the skeptic may then request further justification, thereby setting off an infinite regress. And presumably, we should not be willing to accept an explanation that is never complete, i.e. one that requires further explaining itself. Should the dogmatist try to put a stop to the regress by means of a hypothesis, the skeptic will refuse to accept the claim without proof, perhaps citing alternative, incompatible hypotheses. And finally, the skeptic will refuse to allow the dogmatist to support his explanation by what he is supposed to be explaining, disallowing any circular reasoning. And of course the skeptic may also avail himself of the observation that what is being explained only appears as it does relative to some relevant conditions, and thus, contrary to the dogmatist's presumption, there is no one thing to be explained in the first place (see Barnes [1990]).

iv. Skepticism vs. Relativism

Sextus employs these skeptical modes towards quite a different goal from Aenesidemus'. Aenesidemus, as we have seen, countenances relativistic assertions of the form, X is no more F than not F. This is to say that although X is not really, in its nature, F, it is still genuinely F in some particular circumstance. And it is acceptable for the Aenesidemean skeptic to believe that this is the case. But for Sextus, the skeptical refrain, "I determine nothing" excludes relativistic beliefs as well. It is not acceptable for Sextus to believe that X is F, even with relativistic disclaimers. Instead, Sextus would have us refrain from believing even that X is no more F than not-F. Thus, suspension of judgment extends farther for Sextus than it does for Aenesidemus.

v. The Skeptical Life

So, skepticism is an ability to discover opposed arguments of equal persuasive force, the practice of which leads first to suspension of judgment and afterwards, fortuitously, to tranquility. This makes Sextus' version of Pyrrhonian skepticism dramatically different from other Western philosophical positions, for it is a practice or activity rather than a set of doctrines. Indeed, insofar as the skeptic is supposed to live without belief (adoxastôs), he could not consistently endorse any philosophical doctrine. But how is it possible to live without beliefs?

The short answer is that one may simply follow appearances and withhold judgment as to whether the world really is as it appears. This seems plausible with respect to physical perceptions, but appearances for Sextus include evaluations, and this creates a complication. For how can the skeptic say "this appears good (or bad) to me, but I don't believe that it is really good or bad"? It seems that there is no difference between evaluative appearances and evaluative beliefs.

One possible response to this problem is to say that Sextus only targets sophisticated, philosophical theories about value, or about physics or logic, but allows everyday attitudes and beliefs to stand. On this view, skepticism is a therapy designed to cure the disease of academics and theoreticians. But it seems that Sextus intends his philosophical therapy to be quite widely applicable. The skeptical life, as he presents it, is an achievement and not merely the recovering of a native innocence lost to philosophical speculation. (See Burnyeat and Frede [1997], Brennan [1999] for the debate regarding what the skeptic is supposed to suspend judgment about.)

Any answer to the question about how the skeptic may live without beliefs will depend on what sort of beliefs we think the skeptic avoids. Nevertheless, an elaboration on living in accordance with appearances comes in the form of the fourfold observances. Rather than investigate the best way to live or even what to do in some particular circumstance, Sextus remarks that the skeptic will guide his actions by (1) nature, (2) necessitation by feelings, (3) laws and customs, and (4) kinds of expertise (PH 1.23-24). Nature provides us with the capacity for perception and thought, and we may use these capacities insofar as they don't lead us to dogmatic belief. Similarly, hunger and thirst will drive us towards food and drink without our having to form any explicit beliefs regarding those physical sensations. One need not accept any nutritional theories to adequately and appropriately respond to hunger and thirst. Laws and customs will inform us of the appropriate evaluations of things. We need not actually believe that the gods exist and that they are benevolent to take part in religious ceremonies or even to act in a manner that is (or at least appears) pious. But note that the skeptic will neither believe that the gods exist nor that they do not exist-he is neither a theist nor an atheist, but agnostic in a very robust sense. And finally, the skeptic may practice some trade or profession without accepting any theories regarding his practice. For example, a carpenter need not have any theoretical or geometrical views about doors in order to be skillful at hanging them. Similarly, a doctor need not accept any physiological theories to successfully heal his patients. The further question, recalling the dispute explored in Burnyeat and Frede [1997], is whether the skeptic merely avoids sophisticated, theoretical beliefs in employing these observances, or whether he avoids all beliefs whatsoever.

4. Skepticism and the Examined Life

A unifying feature of the varieties of ancient skepticism is that they are all concerned with promoting, in some manner of speaking, the benefits of recognizing our epistemic limitations. Thus, ancient skeptics nearly always have something to say about how one may live, and indeed live well, in the absence of knowledge.

The fallibilism that developed in Plato's Academy should be seen in this light. Rather than forego the potential benefits of an examination aimed at acquiring better beliefs, the later Academics opted for a less ambitious criterion, one that would give them merely reliable beliefs. Nonetheless, they maintained a thoroughly skeptical attitude towards the possibility of attaining certainty, but without claiming to have conclusively ruled it out.

The more radical skepticism that we find in Sextus' Outlines of Pyrrhonism suggests a move in a different direction. Rather than explain how or why we should trust the skeptical employment of reason, Sextus avoids the problem altogether by, in effect, refusing to answer. Instead, he would suggest that we consider the reasons in support of some particular answer and the reasons opposed in accordance with the skeptical ability so that we may regain tranquility.

5. Greek and Latin Texts, Commentaries, and Translations


  • Long and Sedley, eds. (1987), The Hellenistic Philosophers, (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press), is a good place to start. These volumes contain selections from the primary sources grouped by topic. See volume 1, sections 68-72 and the following commentaries (pp. 438-488) for readings on Academic and Pyrrhonian skepticism, and sections 1-3 with commentaries (pp. 13-24) for readings on Pyrrho. Volume 2 contains the original Greek and Latin texts corresponding to the translations in volume 1.
  • Inwood and Gerson, eds. (1988), Hellenistic Philosophy: Introductory Readings, Indianapolis: Hackett), also contains translated selections from the primary sources for Academic and Pyrrhonian skepticism.
  • Annas and Barnes, eds. (1985), The Modes Of Scepticism, (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press), is a very useful arrangement and translation of the texts that discuss the different varieties of Pyrrhonian argumentation.

For the Greek edition of Photius' summary of Aenesidemus, see R. Henry, ed. (1962), Photius: Bibliothêque, Tome III, (Paris). For a very readable translation, informative introduction and notes, see N.G. Wilson (1994), Photius: The Bibliotheca, (London: Duckworth).

There have been some recently updated and much improved translations and commentaries on Sextus Empiricus.

  • Annas, J. and J. Barnes (1994), Sextus Empiricus: Outlines of Scepticism, (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Bett, R. (1997), Sextus Empiricus: Against the Ethicists (Adversus Mathematikos XI),(Oxford: Oxford University Press).
  • Blank, D. (1998), Sextus Empiricus: Against the Grammarians (Adversus Mathematikos I),(Oxford: Oxford University Press).
  • Greaves, D.D. (1986), Sextus Empiricus: Against the Musicians (Adversus Mathematikos VI), (Lincoln: University of Nebraska Press).
  • Mates, B. (1996), The Skeptic Way: Sextus Empiricus's Outlines of Pyrrhonism, Translated with Introduction and Commentary, (Oxford: Oxford University Press).

Many of the primary texts can be found in the Loeb series, which contains facing pages of text in the original language and translation. Among the most important are (all published by Harvard University Press):

  • Bury, R.G. (1933), trans., Sextus Empiricus: Outlines of Pyrrhonism.
  • Bury, R.G. (1935), trans., Sextus Empiricus: Against the Logicians
  • Bury, R.G. (1936), trans., Sextus Empiricus: Against the Physicists, Against the Ethicists.
  • Bury, R.G. (1949), trans., Sextus Empiricus: Against the Professors. Hicks, R.D. (1925), trans.,Diogenes Laertius: Lives of Eminent Philosophers, vols. 1 and 2.
  • Rackham, H. (1933), trans., Cicero: De Natura Deorum, Academica.
  • Rackham, H. (1914), trans., Cicero: De Finibus Bonorum et Malorum.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Annas, J., (1996), "Scepticism, Old and New," in M. Frede and G. Striker, eds., Rationality in Greek Thought, (Oxford: Clarendon).
  • Annas, J. (1993), The Morality of Happiness, (Oxford: Oxford University Press).
  • Annas, J. (1992), "Plato the Sceptic," in J. Klagge and N. Smith, eds., Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy, Supp. Vol., 43-72.
  • Annas, J. (1990), "Stoic Epistemology," in S. Everson, ed., Epistemology, (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press).
  • Annas, J. (1986), "Doing Without Objective Values: Ancient and Modern Strategies," in M. Schofield, et. al., eds., Norms of Nature (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press).
  • Barnes, J. (1990), The Toils of Scepticism, (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press).
  • Bett, R. (2000), Pyrrho, his antecedents, and his legacy, (Oxford: Oxford University Press).
  • Bett, R. (1990), "Carneades' Distinction Between Approval and Assent," Monist 73.1: 3-20.
  • Bett, R. (1993), "Scepticism and Everyday Attitudes in Ancient and Modern Philosophy," Metaphilosophy24.4: 363-81.
  • Bett, R. (1989), "Carneades' pithanon: A Reappraisal of its Role and Status," Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy 7: 59-94.
  • Brennan, T. (1999), Ethics and Epistemology in Sextus Empiricus, (New York: Garland).
  • Brittain, C. (2001), Philo of Larissa, (Oxford: Oxford University Press).
  • Burnyeat, M. (1984), "The Sceptic in his Place and Time," in Rorty, Schneewind and Skinner, eds.,Philosophy in History, (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press), 225-54, reprinted in Burnyeat and Frede, eds. (1997).
  • Burnyeat, M. and M. Frede, Eds. (1997), The Original Sceptics: A Controversy, (Indianapolis: Hackett).
  • Burnyeat, M., Ed. (1983), The Skeptical Tradition, (Berkeley: University of California Press).
  • Colish, M. (1985), The Stoic Tradition From Antiquity to the Early Middle Ages, vol. 1, (Leiden: Brill).
  • Couissin, P. (1929), "Le Stoicisme de la nouvelle Academie," Revue d'historie de la philosophie 3: 241-76, tr. by Jennifer Barnes and M. Burnyeat as "The Stoicism of the New Academy," in M. Burnyeat, Ed. (1983) 31-63.
  • Flintoff, E. (1980), "Pyrrho and India," Phronesis 25: 88-108.
  • Fogelin, R. (1994), Pyrrhonian Reflections on Knowledge and Justification, (Oxford: Oxford University Press).
  • Frede, D. (1996) "How Sceptical Were the Academic Sceptics?," in R.H. Popkin, ed., Scepticism in the History of Philosophy: A Pan-American Dialogue, 1-26, (Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic).
  • Frede, M. (1987), Essays in Ancient Philosophy, (Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press).
  • Frede, M. (1983/1987), "Stoics and Skeptics on Clear and Distinct Impressions" in M. Burnyeat, ed., (1983), reprinted in Frede (1987), 151-78.
  • Griffin, M. (1997), "The Composition of the Academica: Motives and Versions" in Inwood and Mansfeld, eds. (1997), 1-35.
  • Glucker, J. (1995), "Probabile, Veri Simile, and Related Terms," in J.G.F. Powell, ed., Cicero the Philosopher: Twelve Papers, (Oxford: Oxford University Press).
  • Glucker, J. (1978), Antiochus and the Late Academy, (Gottingen: Vandenhoeck und Ruprecht).
  • Hankinson, R.J. (1998), Cause and Explanation in Ancient Greek Thought, (Oxford: Oxford University Press).
  • Hankinson, R.J. (1997), "Natural Criteria and the Transparency of Judgement: Antiochus, Philo and Galen on Epistemological Justification," in B. Inwood and J. Mansfeld, Eds. (1997), 161-216.
  • Hankinson, R.J. (1995), The Sceptics, (London: Routledge).
  • Inwood, B., and J. Mansfeld, Eds. (1997), Assent and Argument: Studies in Cicero's Academic Books, (Leiden: Brill).
  • Long, A.A. (1974), Hellenistic Philosophy: Stoics, Epicureans and Sceptics, (Berkeley: University of California Press).
  • Long, A.A. (1986), "Diogenes Laertius' Life of Arcesilaus," Elenchos 7: 432-49.
  • Long, A.A. (1988), "Socrates in Hellenistic Philosophy," Classical Quarterly 38: 150-71.
  • MacKendrick, P. (1989), The Philosophical Books of Cicero, (New York: St. Martin's Press).
  • Maconi, H. (1988), "Nova non philosophandi philosophia: A review of Anna Maria Ioppolo,Opinione e Scienza," Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy 6: 231-253.
  • Mansfeld, J. (1997), "Philo and Antiochus in the Lost Catulus," Mnemosyne 50.1: 45-74.
  • Popkin, R. (1979), The History of Scepticism from Erasmus to Spinoza, (Berkeley: University of California Press).
  • Powell, J.G.F. (1995), Cicero the Philosopher: Twelve Papers, (Oxford: Oxford University Press).
  • Schmitt, C. (1972), Cicero Scepticus, (The Hague: Nijhoff).
  • Shields, C. (1994), "Socrates Among the Sceptics," in P. Vander Waerdt, Ed. (1994), The Socratic Movement, (Ithaca: Cornell University Press).
  • Sihvola, J., ed. (2000), Ancient Scepticism and the Sceptical Tradition, (Helsinki : Philosophical Society of Finland).
  • Striker, G. (1996), Essays on Hellenistic Epistemology and Ethics, (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press).
  • Striker, G. (1990/1996), "Ataraxia: Happiness as Tranquility" Monist 73: 97-110, repr. in Striker (1996), 183-195.
  • Striker, G. (1981/1996), "Uber den Unterschied zwischen den Pyrrhoneern und den Akademikern,"Phronesis 26: 153-71, repr. and transl. by M.M. Lee as "On the Difference Between the Pyrrhonists and the Academics" in Striker (1996), 135-49.
  • Striker, G. (1980/1996), "Sceptical Strategies," in M. Schofield, M. Burnyeat, and J. Barnes, Eds. (1980),Doubt and Dogmatism, 54-83, repr. in Striker (1996), 92-115.
  • Tarrant, H. (1985), Scepticism or Platonism: the Philosophy of the 4th Academy, (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press).
  • Thorsrud, H. (2002), "Cicero on His Academic Predecessors: the Fallibilism of Arcesilaus and Carneades," Journal of the History of Philosophy 40: 1-18.
  • Woodruff , P. (1988), "Aporetic Pyrrhonism," Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy 6: 139-68.
  • Woodruff , P. (1986), "The Skeptical Side of Plato's Method," Revue International de Philosophie 156-57: 22-37.

Author Information

Harald Thorsrud
New Mexico State University
U. S. A.

Thales of Miletus (c. 620 B.C.E.—c. 546 B.C.E.)

thalesThe ancient Greek philosopher Thales was born in Miletus in Greek Ionia. Aristotle, the major source for Thales's philosophy and science, identified Thales as the first person to investigate the basic principles, the question of the originating substances of matter and, therefore, as the founder of the school of natural philosophy. Thales was interested in almost everything, investigating almost all areas of knowledge, philosophy, history, science, mathematics, engineering, geography, and politics. He proposed theories to explain many of the events of nature, the primary substance, the support of the earth, and the cause of change. Thales was much involved in the problems of astronomy and provided a number of explanations of cosmological events which traditionally involved supernatural entities. His questioning approach to the understanding of heavenly phenomena was the beginning of Greek astronomy. Thales' hypotheses were new and bold, and in freeing phenomena from godly intervention, he paved the way towards scientific endeavor. He founded the Milesian school of natural philosophy, developed the scientific method, and initiated the first western enlightenment. A number of anecdotes is closely connected to Thales' investigations of the cosmos. When considered in association with his hypotheses they take on added meaning and are most enlightening. Thales was highly esteemed in ancient times, and a letter cited by Diogenes Laertius, and purporting to be from Anaximenes to Pythagoras, advised that all our discourse should begin with a reference to Thales (D.L. II.4).

Table of Contents

  1. The Writings of Thales
  2. Possible Sources for Aristotle
  3. Thales says Water is the Primary Principle
  4. Thales and Mythology
  5. Thales's Primary Principle
  6. New Ideas about the Earth
    1. The Earth Floats on Water
    2. Thales's Spherical Earth
    3. Earthquake Theory
  7. All Things are Full of God
  8. Thales's Astronomy
    1. The Eclipse of Thales
    2. Setting the Solstices
    3. Thales's Discovery of the Seasons
    4. Thales's Determination of the Diameters of the Sun and the Moon
    5. Ursa Minor
    6. Falling into a Well
  9. Mathematics
    1. The Theorems Attributed to Thales
  10. Crossing the Halys
  11. The Possible Travels of Thales
  12. The Milesian School
  13. The Seven Sages of Ancient Greece
  14. Corner in Oil
  15. The Heritage of Thales
  16. References and Further Reading
  17. Abbreviations

1. The Writings of Thales

Doubts have always existed about whether Thales wrote anything, but a number of ancient reports credit him with writings. Simplicius (Diels, Dox. p. 475) specifically attributed to Thales authorship of the so-called Nautical Star-guide. Diogenes Laertius raised doubts about authenticity, but wrote that 'according to others [Thales] wrote nothing but two treatises, one On the Solstice and one On the Equinox' (D.L. I.23). Lobon of Argus asserted that the writings of Thales amounted to two hundred lines (D.L. I.34), and Plutarch associated Thales with opinions and accounts expressed in verse (Plutarch, De Pyth. or. 18. 402 E). Hesychius, recorded that '[Thales] wrote on celestial matters in epic verse, on the equinox, and much else' (DK, 11A2). Callimachus credited Thales with the sage advice that navigators should navigate by Ursa Minor (D.L. I.23), advice which may have been in writing.

Diogenes mentions a poet, Choerilus, who declared that '[Thales] was the first to maintain the immortality of the soul' (D.L. I.24), and in De Anima, Aristotle's words 'from what is recorded about [Thales]', indicate that Aristotle was working from a written source. Diogenes recorded that '[Thales] seems by some accounts to have been the first to study astronomy, the first to predict eclipses of the sun and to fix the solstices; so Eudemus in his History of Astronomy. It was this which gained for him the admiration of Xenophanes and Herodotus and the notice of Heraclitus and Democritus' (D.L. I.23). Eudemus who wrote a History of Astronomy, and also on geometry and theology, must be considered as a possible source for the hypotheses of Thales. The information provided by Diogenes is the sort of material which he would have included in his History of Astronomy, and it is possible that the titles On the Solstice, and On the Equinox were available to Eudemus. Xenophanes, Herodotus, Heraclitus and Democritus were familiar with the work of Thales, and may have had a work by Thales available to them.

Proclus recorded that Thales was followed by a great wealth of geometers, most of whom remain as honoured names. They commence with Mamercus, who was a pupil of Thales, and include Hippias of Elis, Pythagoras, Anaxagoras, Eudoxus of Cnidus, Philippus of Mende, Euclid, and Eudemus, a friend of Aristotle, who wrote histories of arithmetic, of astronomy, and of geometry, and many lesser known names. It is possible that writings of Thales were available to some of these men.

Any records which Thales may have kept would have been an advantage in his own work. This is especially true of mathematics, of the dates and times determined when fixing the solstices, the positions of stars, and in financial transactions. It is difficult to believe that Thales would not have written down the information he had gathered in his travels, particularly the geometry he investigated in Egypt and his measuring of the height of the pyramid, his hypotheses about nature, and the cause of change.

Proclus acknowledged Thales as the discoverer of a number of specific theorems (A Commentary on the First Book of Euclid's Elements 65. 8-9; 250. 16-17). This suggests that Eudemus, Proclus's source had before him the written records of Thales's discoveries. How did Thales 'prove' his theorems if not in written words and sketches? The works On the Solstice, On the Equinox, which were attributed to Thales (D.L. I.23), and the 'Nautical Star-guide, to which Simplicius referred, may have been sources for the History of Astronomy of Eudemus (D.L. I.23).

2. Possible Sources for Aristotle

There is no direct evidence that any written material of Thales was available to Plato and Aristotle, but there is a surprisingly long list of early writers who could have known Thales, or had access to his works, and these must be considered as possible sources for Plato, Aristotle, and the philosophers and commentators who followed them. Aristotle's wording, 'Thales says', is assertive wording which suggests a reliable source, perhaps writings of Thales himself. Anaximander and Anaximenes were associates of Thales, and would have been familiar with his ideas. Both produced written work. Anaximander wrote in a poetical style (Theophr. ap. Simpl. Phys. fr. 2), and the writing of Anaximenes was simple and unaffected (D.L. II.3). Other philosophers who were credited with written works, who worked on topics similar to those of Thales, and who may have provided material for later writers, are Heraclitus of Ephesus, Anaxagoras of Clazomenae, Alcmaeon, Hippo of Samos, and Hippias of Elis.

3. Thales says Water is the Primary Principle

Aristotle defined wisdom as knowledge of certain principles and causes (Metaph. 982 a2-3). He commenced his investigation of the wisdom of the philosophers who preceded him, with Thales, the first philosopher, and described Thales as the founder of natural philosophy (Metaph. 983 b21-22). He recorded: 'Thales says that it is water'. 'it' is the nature, the archê, the originating principle. For Thales, this nature was a single material substance, water. Despite the more advanced terminology which Aristotle and Plato had created, Aristotle recorded the doctrines of Thales in terms which were available to Thales in the sixth century B.C.E., Aristotle made a definite statement, and presented it with confidence. It was only when Aristotle attempted to provide the reasons for the opinions that Thales held, and for the theories that he proposed, that he sometimes displayed caution.

4. Thales and Mythology

Those who believe that Thales inherited his views from Greek or Near-Eastern sources are wrong. Thales was esteemed in his times as an original thinker, and one who broke with tradition and not as one who conveyed existing mythologies. Aristotle unequivocally recorded Thales's hypothesis on the nature of matter, and proffered a number of conjectures based on observation in favour of Thales's declaration (Metaph. 983 b20-28). His report provided the testimony that Thales supplanted myth in his explanations of the behaviour of natural phenomena. Thales did not derive his thesis from either Greek or non-Greek mythological traditions.

Thales would have been familiar with Homer's acknowledgements of divine progenitors but he never attributed organization or control of the cosmos to the gods. Aristotle recognized the similarity between Thales's doctrine about water and the ancient legend which associates water with Oceanus and Tethys, but he reported that Thales declared water to be the nature of all things. Aristotle pointed to a similarity to traditional beliefs, not a dependency upon them. Aristotle did not call Thales a theologian in the sense in which he designated 'the old poets' (Metaph. 1091 b4) and others, such as Pherecydes, as 'mixed theologians' who did not use 'mythical language throughout' (Metaph. 1091 b9). To Aristotle, the theories of Thales were so obviously different from all that had gone before that they stood out from earlier explanations. Thales's views were not ancient and primitive. They were new and exciting, and the genesis of scientific conjecture about natural phenomena. It was the view for which Aristotle acknowledged Thales as the founder of natural philosophy.

5. Thales's Primary Principle

The problem of the nature of matter, and its transformation into the myriad things of which the universe is made, engaged the natural philosophers, commencing with Thales. For his hypothesis to be credible, it was essential that he could explain how all things could come into being from water, and return ultimately to the originating material. It is inherent in Thales's hypotheses that water had the potentiality to change to the myriad things of which the universe is made, the botanical, physiological, meteorological and geological states. In Timaeus, 49B-C, Plato had Timaeus relate a cyclic process. The passage commences with 'that which we now call "water" ', and describes a theory which was possibly that of Thales. Thales would have recognized evaporation, and have been familiar with traditional views, such as the nutritive capacity of mist and ancient theories about spontaneous generation, phenomena which he may have 'observed', just as Aristotle believed he, himself had (Hist. An. 569 b1; Gen. An. 762 a9-763 a34), and about which Diodorus Siculus (I.7.3-5; 1.10.6), Epicurus (ap. Censorinus, D.N. IV.9), Lucretius (De Rerum Natura , V.783-808) and Ovid (Met. I.416-437) wrote.

When Aristotle reported Thales's pronouncement that the primary principle is water, he made a precise statement: 'Thales says that it [the nature of things] is water' (Metaph. 983 b20), but he became tentative when he proposed reasons which might have justified Thales's decision: '[Thales's] supposition may have arisen from observation . . . ' (Metaph. 983 b22). It was Aristotle's opinion that Thales may have observed, 'that the nurture of all creatures is moist, and that warmth itself is generated from moisture and lives by it; and that from which all things come to be is their first principle' (Metaph. 983 b23-25). Then, in the lines 983 b26-27, Aristotle's tone changed towards greater confidence. He declared: 'Besides this, another reason for the supposition would be that the semina of all things have a moist nature . . . ' (Metaph. 983 b26-27). In continuing the criticism of Thales, Aristotle wrote: 'That from which all things come to be is their first principle' (Metaph. 983 b25).

Simple metallurgy had been practised long before Thales presented his hypotheses, so Thales knew that heat could return metals to a liquid state. Water exhibits sensible changes more obviously than any of the other so-called elements, and can readily be observed in the three states of liquid, vapour and ice. The understanding that water could generate into earth is basic to Thales's watery thesis. At Miletus it could readily be observed that water had the capacity to thicken into earth. Miletus stood on the Gulf of Lade through which the Maeander river emptied its waters. Within living memory, older Milesians had witnessed the island of Lade increasing in size within the Gulf, and the river banks encroaching into the river to such an extent that at Priene, across the gulf from Miletus the warehouses had to be rebuilt closer to the water's edge. The ruins of the once prosperous city-port of Miletus are now ten kilometres distant from the coast and the Island of Lade now forms part of a rich agricultural plain. There would have been opportunity to observe other areas where earth generated from water, for example, the deltas of the Halys, the Ister, about which Hesiod wrote (Theogony, 341), now called the Danube, the Tigris-Euphrates, and almost certainly the Nile. This coming-into-being of land would have provided substantiation of Thales's doctrine. To Thales water held the potentialities for the nourishment and generation of the entire cosmos. Aëtius attributed to Thales the concept that 'even the very fire of the sun and the stars, and indeed the cosmos itself is nourished by evaporation of the waters' (Aëtius, Placita, I.3).

It is not known how Thales explained his watery thesis, but Aristotle believed that the reasons he proposed were probably the persuasive factors in Thales's considerations. Thales gave no role to the Olympian gods. Belief in generation of earth from water was not proven to be wrong until A.D. 1769 following experiments of Antoine Lavoisier, and spontaneous generation was not disproved until the nineteenth century as a result of the work of Louis Pasteur.

6. New Ideas about the Earth

Thales proposed answers to a number of questions about the earth: the question of its support; its shape; its size; and the cause of earthquakes; the dates of the solstices; the size of the sun and moon.

a. The Earth Floats on Water

In De Caelo Aristotle wrote: 'This [opinion that the earth rests on water] is the most ancient explanation which has come down to us, and is attributed to Thales of Miletus (Cael. 294 a28-30). He explained his theory by adding the analogy that the earth is at rest because it is of the nature of wood and similar substances which have the capacity to float on water, although not on air (Cael. 294 a30-b1). In Metaphysics (983 b21) Aristotle stated, quite unequivocally: 'Thales . . . declared that the earth rests on water'. This concept does appear to be at odds with natural expectations, and Aristotle expressed his difficulty with Thales's theory (Cael. 294 a33-294 b6).

Perhaps Thales anticipated problems with acceptance because he explained that it floated because of a particular quality, a quality of buoyancy similar to that of wood. At the busy city-port of Miletus, Thales had unlimited opportunities to observe the arrival and departure of ships with their heavier-than-water cargoes, and recognized an analogy to floating logs. Thales may have envisaged some quality, common to ships and earth, a quality of 'floatiness', or buoyancy. It seems that Thales's hypothesis was substantiated by sound observation and reasoned considerations. Indeed, Seneca reported that Thales had land supported by water and carried along like a boat (Sen. QNat. III.14). Aristotle's lines in Metaphysics indicate his understanding that Thales believed that, because water was the permanent entity, the earth floats on water.

Thales may have reasoned that as a modification of water, earth must be the lighter substance, and floating islands do exist. Herodotus (The Histories, II.156) was impressed when he saw Chemmis, a floating island, about thirty-eight kilometres north-east of Naucratis, the Egyptian trading concession which Thales probably visited. Seneca described floating islands in Lydia: 'There are many light, pumice-like stones of which islands are composed, namely those which float in Lydia' (Sen. QNat., III.25. 7-10). Pliny described several floating islands, the most relevant being the Reed Islands, in Lydia (HN, II.XCVII), and Pliny (the Younger) (Ep. VIII.XX) described a circular floating island, its buoyancy, and the way it moved. Thales could have visited the near-by Reed Islands. He might have considered such readily visible examples to be models of his theory, and he could well have claimed that the observation that certain islands had the capacity to float substantiated his hypothesis that water has the capacity to support earth.

Again it is understood that Thales did not mention any of the gods who were traditionally associated with the simple bodies; we do not hear of Oceanus or Gaia: we read of water and earth. The idea that Thales would have resurrected the gods is quite contrary to the bold, new, non-mythical theories which Thales proposed.

b. Thales's Spherical Earth

Modern commentators assume that Thales regarded the earth as flat, thin, and circular, but there is no ancient testimony to support that opinion. On the contrary, Aristotle may have attributed knowledge of the sphericity of the earth to Thales, an opinion which was later reported by Aëtius (Aët. III. 9-10) and followed by Ps.-Plutarch (Epit. III.10). Aristotle wrote that some think it spherical, others flat and shaped like a drum (Arist. Cael. 293 b33-294 a1), and then attributed belief in a flat earth to Anaximenes, Anaxagoras, and Democritus (Arist. Cael. 294 b14-15). If following chronological order, Aristotle's words, 'some think it spherical', referred to the theory of Thales. Aristotle then followed with the theory of Thales's immediate Milesian successor, Anaximander, and then reported the flat earth view of Anaximenes, the third of the Milesian natural philosophers.

There are several good reasons to accept that Thales envisaged the earth as spherical. Aristotle used these arguments to support his own view (Arist. Cael. 297 b25-298 a8). First is the fact that during a solar eclipse, the shadow caused by the interposition of the earth between the sun and the moon is always convex; therefore the earth must be spherical. In other words, if the earth were a flat disk, the shadow cast during an eclipse would be elliptical. Second, Thales, who is acknowledged as an observer of the heavens, would have observed that stars which are visible in a certain locality may not be visible further to the north or south, a phenomena which could be explained within the understanding of a spherical earth. Third, from mere observation the earth has the appearance of being curved. From observation, it appears that the earth is covered by a dome. When observed from an elevated site, the sky seems to surround the earth, like a dome, to meet the apparently curved horizon. If observed over the seasons, the dome would appear to revolve, with many of the heavenly bodies changing their position in varying degrees, but returning annually to a similar place in the heavens. Through his work in astronomy Thales would almost certainly have become familiar with the night sky and the motion of the heavenly bodies. There is evidence that he gave advice to navigate by Ursa Minor, and was so involved in observation of the stars that he fell into a well. As a result of observations made over a long period of time, Thales could have realized that the motions of the fixed stars could not be explained within the idea of the observable hemispherical dome. During the determination of the size of the rising sun, and again while watching its risings and settings during his work on fixing the solstices, Thales may have realized that much natural phenomena could be explained only within the understanding of the earth as a sphere.

From the shore, a ship can be seen to be descending, gradually, below the horizon, with the hull disappearing from view first, to be followed by masts and sails. If one had a companion observing from a higher point, the companion would see the ship for a long period before it disappeared from view.

Aëtius recorded the different opinions of the shape of the earth that were held by Thales, Anaximander and Anaximenes (III.9-10; III.10; and III.10). Cicero attributed to Thales the earliest construction of a solid celestial globe (Rep. I.XIII.22). Thales's immediate successors proposed theories about the shape of the earth which were quite different from each other, but that is no reason to reject the view that Thales hypothesized a spherical earth. It is not the only occasion on which Anaximander and Anaximenes failed to follow the theories of Thales. That they did not do so is the main argument in favour of accepting that the scientific method commenced in the Milesian School. There is testimony that Thales knew the earth to be spherical, but no evidence to suggest that he proposed any other shape.

c. Earthquake Theory

Thales's theory about the cause of earthquakes is consistent with his hypothesis that earth floats upon water. It seems that he applied his floating on water simile to the natural phenomena of earthquakes. Aëtius recorded that Thales and Democritus found in water the cause of earthquakes (Aët. III.15), and Seneca attributed to Thales a theory that on the occasions when the earth is said to quake it is fluctuating because of the roughness of oceans (QNat. III.14; 6.6). Although the theory is wrong, Thales's hypothesis is rational because it provides an explanation which does not invoke hidden entities. It is an advance upon the traditional Homeric view that they resulted from an angry supernatural god, Poseidon, shaking the earth through his rapid striding.

7. All Things are Full of God

The question of whether Thales endowed the gods with a role in his theories is fundamental to his hypotheses. The relevant text from Aristotle reads: 'Thales, too, to judge from what is recorded of his views, seems to suppose that the soul is in a sense the cause of movement, since he says that a stone [magnet, or lodestone] has a soul because it causes movement to iron' (De An. 405 a20-22); 'Some think that the soul pervades the whole universe, whence perhaps came Thales's view that everything is full of gods' (De An. 411 a7-8). In reference to the clause in the first passage 'to judge from what is recorded of his views', Snell convincingly argued that Aristotle had before him the actual sentence recording Thales's views about the lodestone (Snell, 1944, 170). In the second passage the 'some' to whom Aristotle refers are Leucippus, Democritus, Diogenes of Apollonia, Heraclitus, and Alcmaeon, philosophers who were later than Thales. They adopted and adapted the earlier view of Thales that soul was the cause of motion, permeating and enlivening the entire cosmos. The order in which Aristotle discussed Thales's hypothesis obscures the issue.

The source for Aristotle's report that Thales held all things to be full of gods is unknown, but some presume that it was Plato. Thales is not mentioned in the relevant lines in Plato, but there is a popular misconception that they refer to the belief of Thales. This is wrong. Thales had rejected the old gods. In a passage in Apology(26 C) Socrates identified the heavenly bodies as gods, and pointed out that that was the general understanding. In Cratylus(399 D-E) Plato had Socrates explain a relationship between soul as a life-giving force, the capacity to breathe, and the reviving force. In Timaeus 34B) Plato had Timaeus relate a theory which described soul as pervading the whole universe. Then, in Laws Plato has the Athenian Stranger say: 'Everyone . . . who has not reached the utmost verge of folly is bound to regard the soul as a god. Concerning all the stars and the moon, and concerning the years and months and all seasons, what other account shall we give than this very same, - namely, that, inasmuch as it has been shown that they are all caused by one or more souls . . . we shall declare these souls to be gods . . .? Is there any man that agrees with this view who will stand hearing it denied that 'all things are full of gods'? The response is: 'No man is so wrong-headed as that' (Laws, 899 A-B). Plato had the Athenian Stranger extend his ideas into a theological theory. He used a sleight of hand method to express his own ideas about divine spiritual beings. With the exception of gods in the scheme of things, these passages reflect the beliefs which formed the Thalean hypothesis, but Plato did not have the Athenian Stranger attribute the crucial clause 'all things are full of gods' to Thales. Thales is not mentioned.

Aristotle's text not the earliest extant testimony. Diogenes preserved a report from Hippias: 'Aristotle and Hippias affirm that, arguing from the magnet and from amber, [Thales] attributed a soul or life even to inanimate objects' (D.L. I.24). This early report does not mention godly entities. The later commentators, Cicero (Nat. D. I.X.25), and Stobaeus (Ecl. I.1.11) included gods in Thales's theory. However, their views post-date Stoicism and are distorted by theistic doctrines.

Plato converted the idea of soul into a theory that 'all things are full of gods', and this may have been Aristotle's source, but the idea of gods is contrary to Thales's materialism. When Thales defined reality, he chose an element, not a god. The motive force was not a supernatural being. It was a force within the universe itself. Thales never invoked a power that was not present in nature itself, because he believed that he had recognized a force which underpinned the events of nature.

8. Thales's Astronomy

a. The Eclipse of Thales

Thales is acclaimed for having predicted an eclipse of the sun which occurred on 28 May 585 B.C.E. The earliest extant account of the eclipse is from Herodotus: 'On one occasion [the Medes and the Lydians] had an unexpected battle in the dark, an event which occurred after five years of indecisive warfare: the two armies had already engaged and the fight was in progress, when day was suddenly turned into night. This change from daylight to darkness had been foretold to the Ionians by Thales of Miletus, who fixed the date for it within the limits of the year in which it did, in fact, take place' (Hdt. I.74). The vital points are: Thales foretold a solar eclipse; it did occur within the period he specified. How Thales foretold the eclipse is not known but there is strong opinion that he was able to perform this remarkable feat through knowledge of a cycle known as the Saros, with some attributing his success to use of the Exeligmos cycle. It is not known how Thales was able to predict the Eclipse, if indeed he did, but he could not have predicted the Eclipse by using the Saros or the Exeligmos cycles.

In addition to Herodotus, the successful prediction of the eclipse was accepted by Eudemus in his History of Astronomy and acknowledged by a number of other writers of ancient times (Cicero, Pliny, Dercyllides, Clement, Eusebius). This is how Diogenes Laertius recorded the event: '[Thales] seems by some accounts to have been the first to study astronomy, the first to predict eclipses of the sun, and to fix the solstices; so Eudemus in his History of Astronomy. It was this which gained for him the admiration of Xenophanes and Herodotus and the notice of Heraclitus and Democritus' (D.L. I.23). Diogenes asserted that Herodotus knew of Thales's work, and in naming Xenophanes, Heraclitus, and Democritus, he nominated three of the great pre-Socratics, eminent philosophers who were familiar with the work of Thales.

Modern astronomy confirms that the eclipse did occur, and was total. According to Herodotus's report, the umbra of the eclipse of Thales must have passed over the battle field. The "un-naturalness" of a solar eclipse is eerie and chilling. All becomes hushed and there is a strong uncanny sensation of impending disaster, of being within the control of some awful power. In ancient times, the awesome phenomenon must have aroused great fear, anxiety and wonder. The combatants saw the eclipse as disapproval of their warfare, and as a warning. They ceased fighting and a peace agreement was reached between the two kings.

It is not known why Thales turned away from the traditional beliefs which attributed all natural events and man's fortunes and misfortunes to the great family of Olympian gods, but Miletus was the most prosperous of the Ionian cities, and it cannot be doubted that the flourishing merchants believed that their prosperity resulted from their own initiative and endeavours. Thales's great philosophical pronouncement that water is the basic principle shows that Thales gave no acknowledgement to the gods as instigators and controllers of phenomena. Thales's hypotheses indicate that he envisaged phenomena as natural events with natural causes and possible of explanation. From his new perspective of observation and reasoning, Thales studied the heavens and sought explanations of heavenly phenomena.

It is widely accepted that Thales acquired information from Near-Eastern sources and gained access to the extensive records which dated from the time of Nabonassar (747 B.C.E.) and which were later used by Ptolemy (Alm. III.7. H 254). Some commentators have suggested that Thales predicted the solar eclipse of 585 B.C.E. through knowledge of the Saros period, a cycle of 223 lunar months (18 years, 10-11 days plus 0.321124 of a day) after which eclipses both of the sun and moon repeat themselves with very little change, or through knowledge of the Exeligmos cycle which is exactly three times the length of the Saros (Ptolemy, Alm. IV.2. H270). The ancients could not have predicted solar eclipses on the basis of those periodic cycles because eclipses of the sun do not repeat themselves with very little change. The extra 0.321124 of a day means that each recurring solar eclipse will be visible to the west, just under one-third of the circumference of the earth, being a period of time of almost 7.7 hours. This regression to the west could not have been known to the ancient astrologers, a fact which seems not to have been taken into account by the philosophers who attribute Thales's success to application of one of those two cycles.

The following important fact should be noted. Some commentators and philosophers believe that Thales may have witnessed the solar eclipse of 18th May 603 B.C.E. or have had heard of it. They accepted that he had predicted the solar eclipse of 28 May 585 B.C.E. and reasoned from the astronomical fact of the Saros cycles and the fact that the two solar eclipses had been separated by the period of 18 years, 10 days, and 7.7 hours, and concluded that Thales had been able to predict a solar eclipse based upon the knowledge of that cycle. Two facts discount rebut those claims. First, recent research shows that the solar eclipse of 18th May 603 B.C.E. would not have been visible in Egypt, nor in the Babylonian observation cities where the astronomers watched the heavens for expected and unusual heavenly events. The eclipse of 603 passed over the Persian Gulf, too far to the south for observation (Stephenson, personal communication, March 1999; and Stephenson, "Long-term Fluctuations", 165-202). Even if the eclipse of 603 had been visible to the Near-Eastern astronomers, it is not possible to recognize a pattern from witnessing one event, or indeed, from witnessing two events. One may suggest a pattern after witnessing three events that are separated by equal periods of time, but the eclipse which preceded that of 603, and which occurred on 6th May 621, was not visible in Near-Eastern regions. Consequently, it could not have been recorded by the astrologer/priests who watched for unusual heavenly phenomena, and could not have been seen as forming a pattern.

It is quite wrong to say that eclipses repeat themselves with very little change, because each solar eclipse in a particular Saros occurs about 7.7 hours later than in the previous eclipse in the same Saros, and that is about 1/3 of the circumference of the earth's circumference. Adding to the difficulty of recognizing a particular cycle is the fact that about forty-two periodic cycles are in progress continuously, and overlapping at any time. Every series in a periodic cycle lasts about 1,300 years and comprises 73 eclipses. Eclipses which occur in one periodic cycle are unrelated to eclipses in other periodic cycles.

The ancient letters prove that the Babylonians and Assyrians knew that lunar eclipses can occur only at full moon, and solar eclipses only at new moon, and also that eclipses occur at intervals of five or six months. However, while lunar eclipses are visible over about half the globe, solar eclipses are visible from only small areas of the earth's surface. Recent opinion is that, as early as 650 B.C.E. the Assyrian astronomers seem to have recognized the six months-five months period by which they could isolate eclipse possibilities (Steele, "Eclipse Prediction", 429).

In other recent research Britton has analysed a text known as Text S, which provides considerable detail and fine analysis of lunar phenomena dating from Nabonassar in 747 B.C.E. The text points to knowledge of the six-month five month periods. Britton believes that the Saros cycle was known before 525 B.C.E. (Britton, "Scientific Astronomy", 62) but, although the text identifies a particular Saros cycle, and graphically depicts the number of eclipse possibilities, the ancient commentary of Text S does not attest to an actual observation (Britton, "An Early Function", 32).

There is no evidence that the Saros could have been used for the prediction of solar eclipses in the sixth century B.C.E., but it remains possible that forthcoming research, and the transliteration of more of the vast stock of ancient tablets will prove that the Babylonians and Assyrians had a greater knowledge of eclipse phenomena than is now known.

The Babylonian and Assyrian astronomers knew of the Saros period in relation to lunar eclipses, and had some success in predicting lunar eclipses but, in the sixth century B.C.E. when Thales lived and worked, neither the Saros nor the Exeligmos cycles could be used to predict solar eclipses.

It is testified that Thales knew that the sun is eclipsed when the moon passes in front of it, the day of eclipse - called the thirtieth by some, new moon by others (The Oxyrhynchus Papyri, 3710). Aëtius (II.28) recorded: [Thales] says that eclipses of the sun take place when the moon passes across it in a direct line, since the moon is earthy in character; and it seems to the eye to be laid on the disc of the sun'.

There is a possibility that, through analysis of ancient eclipse records, Thales identified another cycle, the lunar eclipse-solar eclipse cycle of 23 1/2 months, the fact that a solar eclipse is a possibility 23 1/2 months after a lunar eclipse. However, lunar eclipses are not always followed by solar eclipses. Although the possibility is about 57% it is important to note that the total solar eclipse of 28th May, 585, occurred 23 1/2months after the total lunar eclipse of 4th July, 587. The wording of the report of the eclipse by Herodotus: 'Thales . . . fixed the date for the eclipse within the limits of the year' is precise, and suggests that Thales's prediction was based upon a definite eclipse theory.

b. Setting the Solstices

A report from Theon of Smyrna ap. Dercyllides states that: 'Eudemus relates in the Astronomy that Thales was the first to discover the eclipse of the sun and that its period with respect to the solstices is not always constant' (DK, 11 A 17). Diogenes Laertius (I.24) recorded that [Thales] was the first to determine the sun's course from solstice to solstice, and also acknowledged the Astronomy of Eudemus as his source.

Solstices are natural phenomena which occur on June 21 or 22, and December 21 or 22, but the determination of the precise date on which they occur is difficult. This is because the sun seems to 'stand still' for several days because there is no discernible difference in its position in the sky. It is the reason why the precise determination of the solstices was so difficult. It was a problem which engaged the early astronomers, and more than seven centuries later, Ptolemy acknowledged the difficulty (Alm. III.1. H203).

It is not known how Thales proceeded with his determination, but the testimony of Flavius Philostratus is that: '[Thales] observed the heavenly bodies . . . from [Mount] Mycale which was close by his home' (Philostratus, Life of Apollonius , II.V). This suggests that Thales observed the rising and setting of the sun for many days at mid-summer and mid-winter (and, necessarily, over many years). Mount Mycale, being the highest point in the locality of Miletus, would provide the perfect vantage point from which to make observations. Another method which Thales could have employed was to measure the length of the noon-day sun around mid-summer and mid-winter. Again this would require observations to be made, and records kept over many days near the solstice period, and over many years.

c. Thales's Discovery of the Seasons

From Diogenes Laertius we have the report: '[Thales] is said to have discovered the seasons of the year and divided it into 365 days' (D.L. I.27). Because Thales had determined the solstices, he would have known of the number of days between say, summer solstices, and therefore have known the length of a solar year. It is consistent with his determination of the solstices that he should be credited with discovering that 365 days comprise a year. It is also a fact that had long been known to the Egyptians who set their year by the more reliable indicator of the annual rising of the star Sirius in July. Thales may have first gained the knowledge of the length of the year from the Egyptians, and perhaps have attempted to clarify the matter by using a different procedure. Thales certainly did not 'discover' the seasons, but he may have identified the relationship between the solstices, the changing position during the year of the sun in the sky, and associated this with seasonal climatic changes.

d. Thales's Determination of the Diameters of the Sun and the Moon

Apuleius wrote that 'Thales in his declining years devised a marvellous calculation about the sun, showing how often the sun measures by its own size the circle which it describes'. (Apul. Florida, 18). Following soon after Apuleius, Cleomedes explained that the calculation could be made by running a water-clock, from which the result was obtained: the diameter of the sun is found to be one seven-hundred-and-fiftieth of its own orbit (Cleomedes, De Motu circulari corporum caelestium, II.75). The third report is from Diogenes: 'According to some [Thales was] the first to declare the size of the sun to be one seven hundred and twentieth part of the solar circle, and the size of the moon to be the same fraction of the lunar circle' (D.L. I.24). Little credence can be given to the water-clock method for reaching this determination, because there is an inbuilt likelihood of repeated errors over the 24 hour period. Even Ptolemy, who flourished in the second century A.D., rejected all measurements which were made by means of water-clocks, because of the impossibility of attaining accuracy by such means (Alm. V.14. H416).

In his work in geometry, Thales was engaged in circles and angles, and their characteristics, and he could have arrived at his solution to the problem by applying the geometrical knowledge he had acquired. There is no evidence to support a suggestion that Thales was familiar with measurements by degrees but he could have learnt, from the Babylonians, that a circle is divided into 3600. The figure of 720, which was given by Diogenes for Thales, is double 360, and this is related to the Babylonian sexagesimal system. To establish the dates of the solstices, Thales probably made repeated observations of the risings and settings of the sun. From such experiments he could have observed that the angle which was subtended by the elevation of the rising sun is 1/20 and with 3600 in a circle, the ratio of 1:720 is determined.

Of the report from Diogenes Laertius (D.L. I.24) that Thales also determined the orbit of the moon in relation to the size of its diameter, Thales would repeat the method to calculate the orbit of the moon.

e. Ursa Minor

Callimachus (D.L. I.22) reported that Thales 'discovered' Ursa Minor. This means only that he recognized the advantages of navigating by Ursa Minor, rather than by Ursa Major, as was the preferred method of the Greeks. Ursa Minor, a constellation of six stars, has a smaller orbit than does the Great Bear, which means that, as it circles the North Pole, Ursa Minor changes its position in the sky to a lesser degree than does the Great Bear. Thales offered this sage advice to the mariners of Miletus, to whom it should have been of special value because Miletus had developed a maritime trade of economic importance.

f. Falling into a Well

In Theaetetus (174 A) Plato had Socrates relate a story that Thales was so intent upon watching the stars that he failed to watch where he was walking, and fell into a well. The story is also related by Hippolytus (Diels, Dox. 555), and by Diogenes Laertius (D.L. II.4-5). Irony and jest abound in Plato's writing and he loved to make fun of the pre-Socratics, but he is not likely to have invented the episode, especially as he had Socrates relate the event. Aristotle wrote that viewing the heavens through a tube 'enables one to see further' (Gen. An. 780 b19-21), and Pliny (HN, II.XI) wrote that: 'The sun's radiance makes the fixed stars invisible in daytime, although they are shining as much as in the night, which becomes manifest at a solar eclipse and also when the star is reflected in a very deep well'. Thales was renowned and admired for his astronomical studies, and he was credited with the 'discovery' of Ursa Minor (D.L. I.23). If Thales had heard that stars could be viewed to greater advantage from wells, either during day or night, he would surely have made an opportunity to test the theory, and to take advantage of a method that could assist him in his observations. The possibility that the story was based on fact should not be overlooked. Plato had information which associated Thales with stars, a well, and an accident. Whether Thales fell into a well, or tripped when he was getting in or out of a well, the story grew up around a mishap.

9. Mathematics

The practical skill of land measurement was invented in Egypt because of the necessity frequently to remeasure plots of land after destructive inundations. The phenomena is well described by Herodotus (II.93-109). Egypt was believed to be the source of much wisdom and reports tell us that many Greeks, including Thales, Pythagoras, Solon, Herodotus, Plato, Democritus, and Euclid, visited that ancient land to see the wonders for themselves.

The Egyptians had little to offer in the way of abstract thought. The surveyors were able to measure and to calculate and they had outstanding practical skills. In Egypt Thales would have observed the land surveyors, those who used a knotted cord to make their measurements, and were known as rope-stretchers. Egyptian mathematics had already reached its heights when The Rhind Mathematical Papyrus was written in about 1800 B.C.E. More than a thousand years later, Thales would have watched the surveyors as they went about their work in the same manner, measuring the land with the aid of a knotted rope which they stretched to measure lengths and to form angles.

The development of geometry is preserved in a work of Proclus, A Commentary on the First Book of Euclid's Elements (64.12-65.13). Proclus provided a remarkable amount of intriguing information, the vital points of which are the following: Geometry originated in Egypt where it developed out of necessity; it was adopted by Thales who had visited Egypt, and was introduced into Greece by him

The Commentary of Proclus indicates that he had access to the work of Euclid and also to The History of Geometry which was written by Eudemus of Rhodes, a pupil of Aristotle, but which is no longer extant. His wording makes it clear that he was familiar with the views of those writers who had earlier written about the origin of geometry. He affirmed the earlier views that the rudiments of geometry developed in Egypt because of the need to re-define the boundaries, just as Herodotus stated.

a. The Theorems Attributed to Thales

Five Euclidean theorems have been explicitly attributed to Thales, and the testimony is that Thales successfully applied two theorems to the solution of practical problems.

Thales did not formulate proofs in the formal sense. What Thales did was to put forward certain propositions which, it seems, he could have 'proven' by induction: he observed the similar results of his calculations: he showed by repeated experiment that his propositions and theorems were correct, and if none of his calculations resulted in contrary outcomes, he probably felt justified in accepting his results as proof. Thalean 'proof' was often really inductive demonstration. The process Thales used was the method of exhaustion. This seems to be the evidence from Proclus who declared that Thales 'attacked some problems in a general way and others more empirically'.

DEFINITION I.17: A diameter of the circle is a straight line drawn through the centre and terminated in both directions by the circumference of the circle; and such a straight line also bisects the circle (Proclus, 124). >

PROPOSITION I.5: In isosceles triangles the angles at the base are equal; and if the equal straight lines are produced further, the angles under the base will be equal (Proclus, 244). It seems that Thales discovered only the first part of this theorem for Proclus reported: We are indebted to old Thales for the discovery of this and many other theorems. For he, it is said, was the first to notice and assert that in every isosceles the angles at the base are equal, though in somewhat archaic fashion he called the equal angles similar (Proclus, 250.18-251.2).

PROPOSITION I.15: 'If two straight lines cut one another, they make the vertical angles equal to one another' (Proclus, 298.12-13). This theorem is positively attributed to Thales. Proof of the theorem dates from the Elements of Euclid (Proclus, 299.2-5).

PROPOSITION I.26: 'If two triangles have the two angles equal to two angles respectively, and one side equal to one side, namely, either the side adjoining the equal angles, or that subtending one of the equal angles, they will also have the remaining sides equal to the remaining sides and the remaining angle equal to the remaining angle' (Proclus, 347.13-16). 'Eudemus in his history of geometry attributes the theorem itself to Thales, saying that the method by which he is reported to have determined the distance of ships at sea shows that he must have used it' (Proclus, 352.12-15). Thales applied this theorem to determine the height of a pyramid. The great pyramid was already over two thousand years old when Thales visited Gizeh, but its height was not known. Diogenes recorded that 'Hieronymus informs us that [Thales] measured the height of the pyramids by the shadow they cast, taking the observation at the hour when our shadow is of the same length as ourselves' (D.L. I.27). Pliny (HN, XXXVI.XVII.82) and Plutarch (Conv. sept. sap. 147) also recorded versions of the event. Thales was alerted by the similarity of the two triangles, the 'quality of proportionality'. He introduced the concept of ratio, and recognized its application as a general principle. Thales's accomplishment of measuring the height of the pyramid is a beautiful piece of mathematics. It is considered that the general principle in Euclid I.26 was applied to the ship at sea problem, would have general application to other distant objects or land features which posed difficulties in the calculation of their distances.

PROPOSITION III.31: 'The angle in a semicircle is a right angle'. Diogenes Laertius (I.27) recorded: 'Pamphila states that, having learnt geometry from the Egyptians, [Thales] was the first to inscribe a right-angled triangle in a circle, whereupon he sacrificed an ox'. Aristotle was intrigued by the fact that the angle in a semi-circle is always right. In two works, he asked the question: 'Why is the angle in a semicircle always a right angle?' (An. Post. 94 a27-33; Metaph. 1051 a28). Aristotle described the conditions which are necessary if the conclusion is to hold, but did not add anything that assists with this problem.

It is testified that it was from Egypt that Thales acquired the rudiments of geometry. However, the evidence is that the Egyptian skills were in orientation, measurement, and calculation. Thales's unique ability was with the characteristics of lines, angles and circles. He recognized, noticed and apprehended certain principles which he probably 'proved' through repeated demonstration.

10. Crossing the Halys

Herodotus recorded 'the general belief of the Greeks' that Thales assisted Croesus in transporting his troops across the Halys river (Hdt. I.75) on his advance into Capadoccia to engage the great Persian conqueror, Cyrus who threatened from the east. Herodotus provided a detailed description of the reported crossing which many of the Greeks supposed had been accomplished through Thales's engineering skills and ingenuity (Hdt. I.75). Herodotus had been told that Thales advised Croesus to divide the river into two parts. The story is that Thales directed the digging so that the river was diverted into two smaller streams, each of which could then be forded. The story from Herodotus describes a formation similar to an oxbow lake. The work could have been undertaken by the men of Croesus's army, and directed by Thales. With both channels then being fordable, Croesus could lead his army across the Halys. This description complies with 'the general belief of the Greeks' which Herodotus related.

However, Herodotus did not accept that story, because he believed that bridges crossed the river at that time (I.74). Herodotus's misgivings were well founded. There is considerable support for the argument that Croesus and his army crossed the Halys by the bridge which already existed and travelled by the Royal Road which provided the main access to the East. Herodotus explained that at the Halys there were gates which had to be passed before one crossed the river, which formed the border, with the post being strongly guarded (Hdt. V.52).

The town of Cesnir Kopru, or Tcheshnir Keupreu, is a feasible site for a crossing. Before the industrialization of the area, a mediaeval bridge was observed, underneath which, when the river was low, could be seen not only the remains of its Roman predecessor but the roughly hewn blocks of a much earlier bridge (Garstang, 1959, 2). Any clues that may have helped to provide an answer to the question of whether there were bridges in the time of Croesus are now submerged by the hydroelectric plants which have been built in the area. Herodotus recorded the details that he had obtained, but used his own different understanding of the situation to discount the report.

11. The Possible Travels of Thales

Establishing whether or not Thales travelled and what countries he visited is important because we may be able to establish what information he could have acquired from other sources. In Epinomis 987 E) Plato made the point that the Greeks took from foreigners what was of value and developed their notions into better ideas.

Eudemus, who was one of Aristotle's students, believed that Thales had travelled to Egypt (Eudemus ap. Proclus, 65.7). A number of ancient sources support that opinion, including Pamphila who held that he spent time with the Egyptian priests (D.L. I.24), Hieronymus from whose report we learn that Thales measured the height of the pyramids by the shadow they cast (D.L. I.27), and Plutarch (De Is. et Os. 131). Thales gave an explanation for the inundation (D.L. I.37). He may have devised this explanation after witnessing the phenomena, which Herodotus later described (Hdt. II.97).

By 620 B.C.E., and perhaps earlier, Miletus held a trading concession at Naucratis (Hdt. II.178, Strab. 17.1.18) on the Canopic mouth of the Nile, and it is possible that Thales visited Egypt on a trading mission. Travel to Egypt would not have been difficult. Homer had Ulysses sailing from Crete to the Nile in five days, and Ernle Bradford recently made a similar journey, proving the trip to be feasible (Bradford, Ulysses Found, 26, and passim). The wealth of Miletus was the result of its success as a trading centre, and there would have been no difficulty in arranging passage on one of the many vessels which traded through of Miletus.

Josephus (Contra Apionem I.2) wrote that Thales was a disciple of the Egyptians and the Chaldeans which suggests that he visited the Near-East. It is thought that Thales visited the Babylonians and Chaldeans and had access to the astrological records which enabled him to predict the solar eclipse of 585 B.C.E.

Miletus had founded many colonies around the Mediterranean and especially along the coasts of the Black Sea. Pliny (HN, V.31.112) gives the number as ninety. The Milesians traded their goods for raw materials, especially iron and timber, and tunny fish. Strabo made mention of 'a sheep-industry', and the yield of 'soft wool' (Strabo, 12.3.13), and Aristophanes mentioned the fine and luxurious Milesian wool (Lysistrata, 729; Frogs, 543). The Milesian traders had access to the hinterland. The land around the mouth of the Halys was fertile, 'productive of everything . . . and planted with olive trees' (Strabo, 12.3.12-13). Thales was associated with a commercial venture in the production of olive oil in Miletus and Chios, but his interests may have extended beyond those two places. Olive oil was a basic item in the Mediterranean diet, and was probably a trading commodity of some importance to Milesian commerce.

It is likely that Thales was one of the 'great teachers' who, according to Herodotus, visited Croesus in the Lydian capital, Sardis (Hdt. I.30). From Sardis, he could have joined a caravan to make the three-month journey along the well used Royal Road (Hdt. V.53), to visit the observatories in Babylonia, and seek the astronomical knowledge which they had accumulated over centuries of observation of heavenly phenomena. In about 547 B.C.E. late in his life, Thales travelled into Cappadocia with Croesus, and, according to some belief, devised a scheme by which the army of Croesus was able to cross the River Halys. Milesian merchantmen continually plied the Black Sea, and gaining a passage could have been easily arranged. From any number of ports Thales could have sought information, and from Sinope he may have ventured on the long journey to Babylonia, perhaps travelling along the valley of the Tigris, as Xenophon did in 401-399 B.C.E.

In a letter purported to be from Thales to Pherecydes, Thales stated that he and Solon had both visited Crete, and Egypt to confer with the priests and astronomers, and all over Hellas and Asia (D.L. I.43-44). All that should be gleaned from such reports, is that travel was not exceptional, with many reports affirming the visits of mainly notable people to foreign lands. Alcaeus visited Egypt' (Strabo, 1.2.30), and his brother, Antimenidas, served in Judaea in the army of the Babylonian monarch, King Nebuchadrezzar. Sappho went into exile in Sicily, her brother,Charaxus, spent some time in Egypt, and a number of friends of Sappho visited Sardis where they lived in Lydian society. There must have been any number of people who visited foreign lands, about whom we know nothing.

Very little about the travels of Thales may be stated with certainty, but it seems probable that he would have sought information from any sources of knowledge and wisdom, particularly the centres of learning in the Near-East. It is accepted that there was ample opportunity for travel.

12. Milesian School

Thales was the founder of a new school of philosophy (Arist. Metaph. 983 b20). His two fellow Milesians who also engaged in the new questioning approach to the understanding of the universe, were Anaximander, his disciple (D.L. I.13), and Anaximenes, who was the disciple of Anaximander (D.L. II.2). Anaximander was about ten years younger than Thales, but survived him by only a year, dying in about 545. Anaximenes was born in 585 and died in about 528. Their lives all overlapped. Through their association they comprised the Milesian School: They all worked on similar problems, the nature of matter and the nature of change, but they each proposed a different material as the primary principle, which indicates that there was no necessity to follow the master's teachings or attribute their discoveries to him. Each proposed a different support for the earth. Thales was held in high regard for his wisdom, being acclaimed as the most eminent of the Wise Men of Ancient Greece, but he was not regarded as a god, as Pythagoras was. Anaximander and Anaximenes were free to pursue their own ideas and to express them in writing. This surely suggests that they engaged in critical discussion of the theories of each other. The Greeks are a sociable people, and their willingness to converse brought rewards in knowledge gained, as Plato remarked (Epinomis, 987E). Critical discussion implies more than familiarity with other views, and more than mere disagreement with other theories. It is the adoption, or in this case, the development, of a new style of discussion. It is a procedure which encourages questioning, debate, explanation, justification and criticism. There was a unique relationship between the three Milesians and it is highly probable that the critical method developed in the Milesian School under the leadership of Thales.

13. The Seven Sages of Ancient Greece

The earliest reference to the Seven Sages of Ancient Greece is in Plato's Protagoras in which he listed seven names: 'A man's ability to utter such remarks [notable, short and compressed] is to be ascribed to his perfect education. Such men were Thales of Miletus, Pittacus of Mitylene, Bias of Priene, Solon of our city [Athens], Cleobulus of Lindus, Myson of Chen, and, last of the traditional seven, Chilon of Sparta. . . . and you can recognize that character in their wisdom by the short memorable sayings that fell from each of them' (Protagoras, 342 E-343 A).

Diogenes recorded that 'Thales was the first to receive the name of Sage in the archonship of Damasias at Athens, when the term was applied to all the Seven Sages, as Demetrius of Phalerum [born. ca. 350 B.C] mentions in his List of Archons (D.L. I.22). Demetrius cannot have been the source for Plato, who died when Demetrius was only three years old. Perhaps there was a source common to both Plato and Demetrius, but it is unknown.

Damasias was archon in 582/1. It may be significant that at this time the Pythian Games were re-organized. More events were added and, for the first time, they were to be held at intervals of four years, in the third year of the Olympiad, instead of the previous eight-yearly intervals. Whether there is an association between the re-organization of the Pythian Games and the inauguration of the Seven Sages in not known but, as Pausanias indicates, the Seven were selected from all around Greece: 'These [the sages] were: from Ionia, Thales of Miletus and Bias of Priene; of the Aeolians in Lesbos, Pittacus of Mitylene; of the Dorians in Asia, Cleobulus of Lindus; Solon of Athens and Chilon of Sparta; the seventh sage, according to the list of Plato, the son of Ariston is not Periander, the son of Cypselus, but Myson of Chenae, a village on Mount Oeta' (Paus. 14.1). The purpose of Damasias may have been aimed at establishing unity between the city-states.

It is difficult to believe that the Seven all assembled at Delphi, although the dates just allow it. Plato wrote that their notable maxims were featured at Delphi: 'They [the Sages], assembled together and dedicated these [short memorable sayings] as the first-fruits of their lore to Apollo in his Delphic temple, inscribing there those maxims which are on every tongue - "Know thyself' and "Nothing overmuch" ' (Pl. Prt. 343 A-B).

Plato regarded wise maxims as the most essential of the criteria for a sage, and associated them with wisdom and with good education, but he has Socrates say: 'Think again of all the ingenious devices in arts or other achievements, such as you might expect in one of practical ability; you might remember Thales of Miletus and Anacharsis the Scythian' (Respublica , 600 A). Practical ability was clearly important.

Several other lists were compiled: Hippobotus (D.L. I.42); Pittacus (D.L. I.42); and Diogenes (D.L. I.13. They omitted some names and adding others. In his work On the Sages, Hermippus reckons seventeen, which included most of the names listed by other compilers.

Many commentators state that Thales was named as Sage because of the practical advice he gave to Miletus in particular, and to Ionia in general. The earlier advice was to his fellow Milesians. In 560, the thirty-five year old Croesus (Hdt. I.25) succeeded his father Alyattes and continued the efforts begun by his father to subdue the Milesians, but without success. Diogenes tells us that 'when Croesus sent to Miletus offering terms of alliance, [Thales] frustrated the plan' (D.L. I.25). The second occasion was at an even later date, when the power of Cyrus loomed as a threat from the east. Thales's advice to the Ionian states was to unite in a political alliance, so that their unified strength could be a defence against the might of Cyrus. This can hardly have been prior to 550 B.C.E. which is thirty years later than the promulgation of the Seven Sages. Thales was not named as a Sage because of any political advice which is extant.

One of the few dates in Thales's life which can be known with certainty is the date of the Eclipse of 585 B.C.E. It brought to a halt the battle being fought between Alyattes and the Mede, Cyaxares and, in addition, brought peace to the region after 'five years of indecisive warfare' (Hdt. I.74). The Greeks believed that Thales had predicted the Eclipse, and perhaps even regarded him as being influential in causing the phenomenon to occur. This was reason enough to declare Thales to be a man of great wisdom and to designate him as the first of the Seven Sages of Ancient Greece.

14. Corner in Oil

Thales's reputation for wisdom is further enhanced in a story which was related by Aristotle. (Politics, 1259 a 6-23). Somehow, through observation of the heavenly bodies, Thales concluded that there would be a bumper crop of olives. He raised the money to put a deposit on the olive presses of Miletus and Chios, so that when the harvest was ready, he was able to let them out at a rate which brought him considerable profit. In this way, Thales answered those who reproached him for his poverty. As Aristotle points out, the scheme has universal application, being nothing more than a monopoly. There need not have been a bumper harvest for the scheme to have been successful. It is quite likely that Thales was involved in commercial ventures, possibly the export of olive oil, and Plutarch reported that Thales was said to have engaged in trade (Plut. Vit. Sol. II.4).

15. The Heritage of Thales

Thales is the first person about whom we know to propose explanations of natural phenomena which were materialistic rather than mythological or theological. His theories were new, bold, exciting, comprehensible, and possible of explanation. He did not speak in riddles as did Heraclitus, and had no need to invent an undefined non-substance, as Anaximander did. Because he gave no role to mythical beings, Thales's theories could be refuted. Arguments could be put forward in attempts to discredit them. Thales's hypotheses were rational and scientific. Aristotle acknowledged Thales as the first philosopher, and criticized his hypotheses in a scientific manner.

The most outstanding aspects of Thales's heritage are: The search for knowledge for its own sake; the development of the scientific method; the adoption of practical methods and their development into general principles; his curiosity and conjectural approach to the questions of natural phenomena - In the sixth century B.C.E., Thales asked the question, 'What is the basic material of the cosmos?' The answer is yet to be discovered.

16. References and Further Reading

  • Ernle Bradford. Ulysses Found. London: Hodder and Stoughton, 1964.
  • Britton, John P. "An Early Function for Eclipse Magnitudes in Babylonian Astronomy." Centaurus, 32 (1989): 32.
  • Britton, John P. "Scientific Astronomy in Pre-Seleucid Babylon." Chapter in H.D. Galter, Die Rolle der Astronomy in den Kulteren Mesopotamiens. Graz: 1993.
  • Garstang, John and O.R. Gurney. The Geography of the Hittite Empire. Occasional Publications of The British Institute of Archaeology in Ankara, no. 5. London: The British Institute of Archaeology at Ankara, 1959.
  • Proclus. A Commentary on the First Book of Euclid's Elements. Translated with an Introduction and Notes by Glenn R Morrow. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1970.
  • Ptolemy. Ptolemy'snAlmagest. Translated and Annotated by G.J. Toomer. London: Duckworth, 1984.
  • Snell, Bruno. "Die Nachrichten über die Lehren des Thales und die Anfänge der griechischen Philosophie - und Literaturgeschichte." [The News about the Teachings of Thales and the Beginnings of the Greek History of Philosophy and Literature], Philologus 96 (1944): 170-182.
  • Steele, John M."Eclipse Prediction in Mesopotamia." Archive for History of Exact Science 54 (5) (2000):421-454.
  • Stephenson, F. Richard, and L.V. Morrison. "Long-term fluctuations in the Earth's rotation: 700 BC to AD 1990." Philosophical Transactions of the Royal Society of London351 (1995): 165-202.

17. Abbreviations

  • Aristotle, An. Post., Analytica Posteriora; Cael., De Caelo; De An., De Anima; Gen An., De Generatione Animalium; Hist. An., Historia Animalium; Metaph., Metaphysics; Pol., Politics; Hist. An.; Historia Animalium
  • Cicero, Rep., De Republica; Nat. D., De Natura Deorum
  • D.L., Diogenes Laertius, Lives of Eminent Philosophers
  • Diels,Dox., H. Diels, Doxographi Graeci
  • DK, Diels, Hermann and Walther Kranz.Die Fragmente der Vorsokratiker. Zurich: Weidmann, 1985.
  • Epicurus, ap.Censorinus, D.N.; Censorinus, De die natali
  • Ovid,Met., Metamorphoses
  • Plutarch,Plut. De Is. et Os., De Iside et Osiride; De Pyth. or., De Pythiae oraculis; Conv. sept. sap., Convivium septem sapientium, [The Dinner of the Seven Wise Men];; Vit. Sol., Vitae Parallelae, Solon
  • Pliny (the Elder), HN: Naturalis Historia
  • Pliny (the Younger), Ep: Epistulae
  • Ps.-Plutarch, Epit;Pseudo-Plutarch, Epitome
  • Seneca, QNat., Quaestiones Naturales
  • Stobaeus, Ecl., jEklogaiv ['Selections']
  • Theophr. ap. Simpl. Phys., Theophrastus, ap. Simplicius, in Physics

Author Information

Patricia O'Grady
The Flinders University of South Australia

Theophrastus (c. 371—c. 287 B.C.E.)

TheophrastusTheophrastus was a Greek philosopher of the Peripatetic school, and immediate successor of Aristotle in leadership of the Lyceum. He was a native of Eresus in Lesbos, and studied philosophy at Athens, first under Plato and afterwards under Aristotle. He became the favorite pupil of Aristotle, who named Theophrastus his successor, and bequeathed to him his library and manuscripts of his own writings. Theophrastus sustained the Aristotelian character of the Lyceum. He is said to have had 2,000 disciples, among them the comic poet Menander. He was esteemed by the kings Philippus, Cassander, and Ptolemy. He was tried for impiety, but acquitted by the Athenian jury. He died in 287 BCE, having presided over the Lyceum about thirty-five years. His age is sometimes put at 85, and 107 by others. He is said to have closed his life with the complaint about the short duration of human life, that it ended just when the insight into its problems was beginning.

Although Theophrastus generally followed Aristotle's lead in philosophy, he was no mere slavish imitator, and he continued important empirical and philosophical investigations of his own. Very little of his work survives, but he seems in general to have emphasized the empiricist side of Aristotle's thought and downplayed remaining Platonist elements, a trend that was further continued by Theophrastus' successor as head of the Lyceum, Strato. Theophrastus criticized some of Aristotle's arguments for the existence of a Prime Mover, and he expressed dissatisfaction with Aristotle's universal application of teleological (that is, goal-directed) explanations. Theophrastus also composed a large compendium of the doctrines of previous philosophers, which itself is lost, but which probably formed the basis for much of the later doxography which is our main source of information on the pre-Socratic philosophers.

Author Information

The author of this article is anonymous. The IEP is actively seeking an author who will write a replacement article.

Timon (fl. 279 B.C.E.)

TimonTimon was a disciple of Pyrrho and philosopher of the sect of the Skeptics, who flourished in the reign of Ptolemy Philadelphus, about 279 BCE. and onwards. The son of Timarchus of Phlius, Timon first studied philosophy at Megara, under Stilpo, and then returned home and married. He next went to Elis with his wife, and heard Pyrrho, whose tenets he adopted. Driven from Elis by straitened circumstances, he spent some time on the Hellespont and the Propontis, and taught at Chalcedon as a sophist with such success that he acquired a fortune. He then moved to Athens, where he passed the remainder of his life, with the exception of a short residence at Thebes. He died at the age of almost ninety. Timon appears to have had an active mind, and with a quick perception of the follies of people which betrays its possessor into a spirit of universal distrust both of men and truths, so as to make him a skeptic in philosophy and a satirist in everything. His agnosticism (to use a modern term) is shown by his saying that people need only know three things -- namely, what is the nature of things, how we are related to them, and what we can gain from them. But as our knowledge of things must always be subjective and unreal, we can only live in a state of suspended judgment. He wrote numerous works both in prose and poetry. The most celebrated of his poems were the satiric compositions called silli, a word of somewhat doubtful etymology, but which undoubtedly describes metrical compositions of a character at once ludicrous and sarcastic. The invention of this species of poetry is ascribed to Xenophones of Colophon. The Silli of Timon were in three books, in the first of which he spoke in his own person, and the other two are in the form of a dialogue between the author and Xenophanes of Colophon, in which Timon proposed questions to which Xenophanes replied at length. The subject was a sarcastic account of the tenets of all philosophers, living and dead -- an unbounded field for skepticism and satire. They were in hexameter verse, and from the way in which they are mentioned by the ancient writers, as well as from the few fragments of them which have come down to us, it is evident that they were admirable productions. (Diog. Laert. ix. 12, 109-155; Euseb. Praep. Ev. xiv. p. 761).

Author Information

The author of this article is anonymous. The IEP is actively seeking an author who will write a replacement article.

Diels-Kranz Numbering System

Of the writings of the Presocratics, only quotations embedded in the works of later authors have survived. These quotations, along with reports about the Presocratics and imitations of their works, were first compiled into a standard edition (Die Fragmente der Vorsokratiker) in the nineteenth century by Hermann Diels (1848-1922) with revisions by Walther Kranz and subsequent editors, in a complete edition of all the works of Presocratic authors which has become standard in the field of ancient philosophy. The works of Presocratics, therefore, are normally referred to by DK numbers. In Diels-Kranz, each author is assigned a number, and within that author's number, entries are divided into three groups labeled alphabetically:

  1. testimonia: ancient accounts of the authors' life and doctrines
  2. ipsissima verba (literally, exact words, sometimes also termed "fragments"): the exact words of the author
  3. imitations: works which take the author as a model

Within each of these three groups, individual fragments or testimonia are assigned sequential numbers. So, for example, since Protagoras is the eightieth author in Diels-Kranz, the third testimony concerning him, a generally unreliable short biography by Hesychius, would be referred to as DK80a3.

Diels, Hermann and Walther Kranz. Die Fragmente der Vorsokratiker. Zurich: Weidmann, 1985.

Freeman, Kathleen. Ancilla to the Pre-Socratic Philosophers. Cambridge: Harvard Univ Pr., 1983 (reprint edition).

This book is a complete English translation of the 'b' passages--the so-called 'fragments'--from Die Fragmente der Vorsokratiker.

Author Information

Carol Poster
Florida State University

Carneades (c. 214–129 B.C.E.)

carneadesCarneades was perhaps the most prominent head of the skeptical Academy in ancient Greece. Following the example of Arcesilaus, who turned the Academy in a skeptical direction, Carneades developed an array of arguments against the dogmatic positions upheld by other philosophers, particularly the Stoics. He went beyond Arcesilaus in several respects, however. Instead of simply arguing against the positive positions of other philosophers, Carneades also set forth arguments of his own in favor of views that sometimes had never been defended before--not in order to establish their truth, but simply to counterbalance the arguments of the dogmatists and show that none of their conclusions can be conclusively established. In doing so, Carneades made important contributions to several philosophical debates. Carneades also set forth a more detailed skeptical criterion of what to believe, to pithanon which means either the "plausible" or the "probable."

Table of Contents

  1. Skeptical Practice
  2. Contributions to Philosophical Debates
  3. Practical Criterion: To Pithanon

1. Skeptical Practice

Carneades continued the skeptical academy's attack upon Stoic epistemology. Arcesilaus had argued against Zeno, the founder of Stoicism, that no sense-impressions could provide a firm foundation for knowledge, since sense-impressions are always fallible. Carneades maintained this criticism against refinements in the Stoics' theory made by Chrysippus, the head of the Stoa at his time. But Carneades went beyond criticizing the arguments of other philosophers by trying to propound equally convincing arguments for incompatible conclusions, which would have the effect of leaving his interlocutor suspending judgement as to which is true. For instance, while on a mission to Rome with the heads of two other philosophical schools, Carneades gave an eloquent defense of traditional views on justice one day, and the next day offered an equally eloquent attack on those same views. (Unamused traditionalist Romans expelled the philosophers from the city as a result.)

2. Contributions to Philosophical Debates

In arguing for contrary positions, Carneades sometimes came up with novel positions or arguments. For instance, Carneades gave a taxonomy of different possible candidates for what the highest good could be, and in so doing, came up with possibilities not canvassed by previous philosophers. He also defended original views in the debate between the Stoics and Epicureans on human freedom, determinism, and the truth-values of statements about the future. Against both Epicurus and the Stoics, Carneades argued that no deterministic consequences follow from the principle of bivalence (the principle that for any statement P, either P is true or P is false). That is because, even if it has always been true that e.g., I will brush my teeth tomorrow, that does not imply that there are "immutable eternal causes" which will bring it about that I will do so. It can be true now simply in virtue of the fact that brushing my teeth is actually what I will freely choose to do. Similarly, Carneades said that Epicureans can defend human freedom from causal determinism without positing a random atomic swerve. A person can be the cause of his actions by a "free movement of the mind", without there being antecedent causes that necessitate that the agent will do what he does. This is reminiscent of the theories of "agent-causation" later propounded by writers like Chisholm.

3. Practical Criterion: To Pithanon

Carneades also developed a detailed skeptical criterion, to pithanon--which can mean either "the plausible" or "the probable." Sense-impressions can never be a sure guide to truth, thought Carneades, but some are still more convincing to us than others--some seem plausible, and others not. We need not stop there however--we can make further investigation of convincing impressions to see if they stand up or not, as well as seeing whether they cohere with our other sense-impressions.

Exactly how to understand Carneades' criterion was controversial even in his own day. Carneades left no writings, other than a few letters, and Clitomachus, who was Carneades' closest associate and succeeded him as head of the Academy, said he did not know what Carneades really thought. Two questions are: (1) Are pithanon beliefs supposed to be more likely to be true (as Cicero and Philo thought), or simply more plausible to the person who accepts them? (2) Is Carneades advocating to pithanon in his own voice as a criterion that a skeptic could use, or is he simply employing it in service of his arguments against the Stoics, without being committed to it himself?

For more information on Carneades, see the section on him in the entry on ancient Greek skepticism.

Author Information

The author of this article is anonymous. The IEP is actively seeking an author who will write a replacement article.

Arcesilaus (c. 315—240 B.C.E.)

Arcesilaus was the sixth head of Plato's academy. He turned the academy in a skeptical direction. After Plato's death, the headship of the academy passed to a series of men who developed metaphysical and ethical systems inspired by the positive arguments contained in dialogues such as the Republic and the Phaedo. Arcesilaus, however, turned away from such system-building and instead spent his energies in attacking the arguments of others. According to Cicero, the aim of such attacks was to produce epoche, or suspension of judgment.

Some later commentators claim that by making this skeptical turn, Arcesilaus abandoned Platonism. However, sympathetic writers like the academic skeptic Cicero assert that much of Plato's writings are actually more in harmony with Arcesilaus' practice than with dogmatic system-building. In dialogues like the Euthyphro and Laches, Socrates is shown questioning other people's definitions of terms such as piety and courage. In so doing, Socrates shows that they do not know what they think that they know. However, Socrates' questioning does not lead to positive answers to the questions he raises. In the Apology Socrates claims that he has no knowledge of his own, but that he is wiser than other people only insofar as he knows that he does not know, whereas others are ignorant even of their own ignorance. Arcesilaus goes beyond this, saying that he knows nothing, not even that that he knows nothing. Later academic skeptics like Cicero also stress the tentative and exploratory nature of dialogues like the Republic: although they do contain positive arguments, the dialogue form, the back-and-forth among the speakers, and Socrates' own disavowals at many points of having conclusively established what he argues for should make us wary of looking at the dialogues as treatises that expound Platonic doctrine.

The Stoics were the main target of Arcesilaus' attacks. The founder of Stoicism, Zeno of Citium, developed a systematic and elaborate metaphysics, ethics, and epistemology. Zeno claimed that there are certain sense-impressions—so-called kataleptic or "graspable" impressions—which are the foundation and criterion of knowledge. These impressions come from objects in the environment and accurately represent these objects. The Stoics also thought that the wise person would never assent to what is uncertain, and thus would never be mistaken. Arcesilaus argued that, according to the Stoics' own standards, the Stoic wise person would never assent to anything, since no sense-impression is ever infallible. For any sense-impression, Arcesilaus said, even if it is accurate, it is always possible in principle that there be a qualitatively indistinguishable sense-impression that is inaccurate, and the wise person would thus have no way of telling which sense-impressions are accurate andwhich ones are not.

The Stoics thought that without a criterion for knowledge, it would be impossible to have any basis on which to act. Arcesilaus, however, said that we can act on the basis the eulogon—the "reasonable." The eulogon is not a criterion of knowledge, since what is eulogon can be mistaken, but it can be a basis of action.

Arcesilaus left no writings of his own, so we must rely on second and third-hand reports in order to reconstruct his views. Even in ancient times, however, Arcesilaus' views were heavily debated. One major question is whether Arcesilaus himself thought that it is impossible to gain knowledge, or just that it is impossible, given the assumptions of the Stoics about the nature of knowledge. Similarly, it is not clear whether Arcesilaus advanced the eulogon as his own skeptical criterion for action, or whether he simply advanced it to rebut Stoic claims about the necessity of a criterion of knowledge for action.

For more information on Arcesilaus, see the section on him in the entry on ancient Greek skepticism.

Author Information

The author of this article is anonymous. The IEP is actively seeking an author who will write a replacement article.

Damon (5th cn. B.C.E.)

Damon was a Pythagorean philosopher of Syracuse. Damon was a close friend to Phintias the Pythagorean. Dionysius, the tyrant, having condemned Phintias to death for conspiring against him, Phintias begged that leave might be allowed him to go for a short period to a neighboring place, in order to arrange some family affairs, and offered to leave one of his friends in the hands of Dionysius as a pledge for his return by an appointed time, and who would be willing, in case Phintias broke his word, to die in his stead. Dionysius, skeptical as to the existence of such friendship, and prompted by curiosity, assented to the arrangement, and Damon took the place of Phintias. The day appointed for the return of Phintias arrived, and the public expectation was highly excited as to the probable issue of this singular affair. The day drew to a close; no Phintias came; and Damon was in the act of being led to execution, when, of a sudden, the absent friend, who had been detained by unforeseen and unavoidable obstacles, presented imself to the eyes of the admiring crowd and saved the life of Damon. Dionysius was so much struck by this instance of true attachment that he pardoned Phintias, and entreated the two to allow him to share their friendship (Val. Max. iv. 7; Plut. De Amic Mult.).

Author Information

The author of this article is anonymous. The IEP is actively seeking an author who will write a replacement article.

Aenesidemus (1st cn. C.E.)

Aenesidemus was the founder of Pyrrhonian Skepticism. He was born at Gnossus in Crete, but lived at Alexandria and flourished shortly after Cicero. Aenesidemus originally was a member of Plato's Academy. From the time of Arcesilaus through Carneades, at least, the Academy was skeptical. By the time of Aenesidemus, however, the Academy had splintered into several competing factions and considerably softened or even abandoned its skepticism, as a result of its dialectical interchange with the Stoics. One head of the Academy, Philo, turned to a form of moderate fallibilism, in which one could assent to many beliefs and gain knowledge, although not certainty, while a later head, Antiochus, propounded a dogmatic and syncretistic philosophy, claiming that at bottom Plato, the Stoics, and many other philosophers were really saying the same thing.

Aenesidemus complained that the situation had deteriorated to the point where the Academics were no more than "Stoics in conflict with Stoics," and he broke with the Academy and founded his own school, taking Pyrrho as its namesake. To strengthen the cause of skepticism, he developed the ten tropes or modes of skepticism—a set of skeptical argument forms, or modes, to show that judgment must be withheld on any issue. All are based on some form of relativity—e.g., the same object can give rise to different perceptions, depending on the bodily condition of the percipient--conjoined with the claim that there is no criterion by which to adjudicate which of the perceptions, customs, etc., are correct. Although Diogenes Laertius attributes the ten modes to Pyrrho, it is likely that they owe their existence to Aenesidemus. Extracts of the ten modes are found in Photius.

Briefly, the ten modes are as follows: (1) The feelings and perceptions of all living beings differ. (2) People have physical and mental differences, which make things appear different to them. (3) The different senses give different impressions of things. (4) Our perceptions depend on our physical and intellectual conditions at the time of perception. (5) Things appear different in different positions, and at different distances. (6) Perception is never direct, but always through a medium. For example, we see things through the air. (7) Things appear different according to variations in their quantity, color, motion, and temperature. (8) A thing impresses us differently when it is familiar and when it is unfamiliar. (9) All supposed knowledge is predication. All predicates give us only the relation of things to other things or to ourselves; they never tell us what the thing in itself is. (10) The opinions and customs of people are different in different countries.

For more information on Aenesidemus, see the section on him in the entry on Ancient Greek Skepticism.

Author Information

The author of this article is anonymous. The IEP is actively seeking an author who will write a replacement article.

Democritus (460—370 B.C.E.)

democritusDemocritus was born at Abdera, about 460 BCE, although according to some 490. His father was from a noble family and of great wealth, and contributed largely towards the entertainment of the army of Xerxes on his return to Asia. As a reward for this service the Persian monarch gave and other Abderites presents and left among them several Magi. Democritus, according to Diogenes Laertius, was instructed by these Magi in astronomy and theology. After the death of his father he traveled in search of wisdom, and devoted his inheritance to this purpose, amounting to one hundred talents. He is said to have visited Egypt, Ethiopia, Persia, and India. Whether, in the course of his travels, he visited Athens or studied under Anaxagoras is uncertain. During some part of his life he was instructed in Pythagoreanism, and was a disciple of Leucippus. After several years of traveling, Democritus returned to Abdera, with no means of subsistence. His brother Damosis, however, took him in. According to the law of Abdera, whoever wasted his patrimony would be deprived of the rites of burial. Democritus, hoping to avoid this disgrace, gave public lectures. Petronius relates that he was acquainted with the virtues of herbs, plants, and stones, and that he spent his life in making experiments upon natural bodies. He acquired fame with his knowledge of natural phenomena, and predicted changes in the weather. He used this ability to make people believe that he could predict future events. They not only viewed him as something more than mortal, but even proposed to put him in control of their public affairs. He preferred a contemplative to an active life, and therefore declined these public honors and passed the remainder of his days in solitude.

Credit cannot be given to the tale that Democritus spent his leisure hours in chemical researches after the philosopher's stone -- the dream of a later age; or to the story of his conversation with Hippocrates concerning Democritus's supposed madness, as based on spurious letters. Democritus has been commonly known as "The Laughing Philosopher," and it is gravely related by Seneca that he never appeared in public with out expressing his contempt of human follies while laughing. Accordingly, we find that among his fellow-citizens he had the name of "the mocker". He died at more than a hundred years of age. It is said that from then on he spent his days and nights in caverns and sepulchers, and that, in order to master his intellectual faculties, he blinded himself with burning glass. This story, however, is discredited by the writers who mention it insofar as they say he wrote books and dissected animals, neither of which could be done well without eyes.

Democritus expanded the atomic theory of Leucippus. He maintained the impossibility of dividing things ad infinitum. From the difficulty of assigning a beginning of time, he argued the eternity of existing nature, of void space, and of motion. He supposed the atoms, which are originally similar, to be impenetrable and have a density proportionate to their volume. All motions are the result of active and passive affection. He drew a distinction between primary motion and its secondary effects, that is, impulse and reaction. This is the basis of the law of necessity, by which all things in nature are ruled. The worlds which we see -- with all their properties of immensity, resemblance, and dissimilitude -- result from the endless multiplicity of falling atoms. The human soul consists of globular atoms of fire, which impart movement to the body. Maintaining his atomic theory throughout, Democritus introduced the hypothesis of images or idols (eidola), a kind of emanation from external objects, which make an impression on our senses, and from the influence of which he deduced sensation (aesthesis) and thought (noesis). He distinguished between a rude, imperfect, and therefore false perception and a true one. In the same manner, consistent with this theory, he accounted for the popular notions of Deity; partly through our incapacity to understand fully the phenomena of which we are witnesses, and partly from the impressions communicated by certain beings (eidola) of enormous stature and resembling the human figure which inhabit the air. We know these from dreams and the causes of divination. He carried his theory into practical philosophy also, laying down that happiness consisted in an even temperament. From this he deduced his moral principles and prudential maxims. It was from Democritus that Epicurus borrowed the principal features of his philosophy.

Author Information

The author of this article is anonymous. The IEP is actively seeking an author who will write a replacement article.

Demonax (2nd cn. C.E.)

Demonax was a philosopher of the second century CE. who tried to revive the philosophy of the Cynic School. Born in Cyprus, Demonax went to Athens, where he became so popular that people vied with on another in presenting him with food, and even the young children gave him great quantities of fruit. Much less austere than Diogenes, whom he took as his philosophic model, he nevertheless rebuked vice unsparingly, and was charged with neglecting the Eleusinian Mysteries, to which he replied: "If the mysteries are bad, no one should be initiated; and if they are good, they ought to be open to everyone." He was friend of Epictetus, who once rebuked him for not marrying, but was silenced by Demonax, who said, "Very well; give me one of your daughters for a wife" -- Epictetus being himself a bachelor. Demonax lived to be nearly a hundred, and on his death was buried with great magnificence. See the Demonax of Lucian, in which the character of the philosopher is painted in glowing colors.

Author Information

The author of this article is anonymous. The IEP is actively seeking an author who will write a replacement article.

Diogenes Laertius (3rd cn. C.E.)

Diogenes Laertius, native of Laerte in Cilicia, was a biographer of ancient Greek philosophers. His Lives of the Philosophers (Philosophoi Biol), in ten books, is still extant and is an important source of information on the development of Greek philosophy. The period when he lived is not exactly known, but it is supposed to have been during the reigns of Septimius Severus and Caracalla. Because of his long and fairly sympathetic account of Epicurus, some think that Diogenes belonged to the Epicurean School, but this is not clear. He expresses his admiration for many philosophers, but his own allegiances, if any, are not stated.

He divides all the Greek philosophers into two classes: those of the Ionic and those of the Italic school. He derives the first from Anaximander, the second from Pythagoras. After Socrates, he divides the Ionian philosophers into three branches: (a) Plato and the Academics, down to Clitomachus; (b) the Cynics, down to Chrysippus; (c) Aristotle and Theophrastus. The series of Italic philosophers consists, after Pythagoras, of the following: Telanges, Xenophanes, Parmenides, Zeno of Elea, Leucippus, Democritus, and others down to Epicurus. The first seven books are devoted to the Ionic philosophers; the last three treat of the Italic school.

The work of Diogenes is a crude contribution towards the history of philosophy. It contains a brief account of the lives, doctrines, and sayings of most persons who have been called philosophers; and though the author is limited in his philosophical abilities and assessment of the various schools, the book is valuable as a collection of facts, which we could not have learned from any other source, and is entertaining as a sort of pot-pourri on the subject. Diogenes also includes samples of his own wretched poetry about the philosophers he discusses.

Diogenes is generally as reliable as whatever source he happens to be copying from at that moment. Especially when Diogenes is setting down amusing or scandalous stories about the lives and deaths of various philosophers which are supposed to serve as fitting illustrations of their thought, the reader should be wary. The article on Epicurus, however, is quite valuable, since it contains some original letters of that philosopher, which comprise a summary of the Epicurean doctrines.

Author Information

The author of this article is anonymous. The IEP is actively seeking an author who will write a replacement article.

Prodicus (fl. 5th c. B.C.E.)

Prodicus was a sophist and rhetorician from Iulis on the island of Ceos. He was contemporary with Democritus and Gorgias, and was a disciple of Protagoras. He flourished in the 86th Olympiad, and it is reported that his disciples included Socrates, Euripides, Theramenes, and Isocrates. His countrymen, after giving him several public jobs, sent him as ambassador to Athens. He was so well received there that he was induced to open a school of rhetoric. In his lectures on literary style he laid stress on the right use of words and the accurate discrimination between synonyms. Plato frequently satirizes him as a pedantic lecturer on the niceties of language. Plato also insinuates that the prospect of wealth prompted Prodicus to open his school, and indeed his lectures seem to have brought him much money. Philostratus also notes that Prodicus was fond of money. He used to go from one city to another displaying his eloquence, and, though he did it in a mercenary way, he nevertheless had great honors paid to him in Thebes and Lacedaemon. His charge to a pupil was fifty drachmae. Aristophanes, however, describes him as the most remarkable of the natural philosophers for wisdom and character. It is reported that people flocked to hear Prodicus, although he had an unpleasant sounding voice. It also related that Xenophon, when a prisoner in Boeotia, desiring to hear Prodicus, came up with the required bail and went and gratified his curiosity (Philostr. l. c.). None of his lectures has come down to us in its original form. His most famous work is The Choice of Hercules, and was frequently cited. The original is lost, but the substance of it is in Xenophon's Memorabilia(2:1:21). Prodicus was put to death by the Athenians on the charge of corrupting their youth. Sextus Empiricus ranks him among the atheists, and Cicero remarks that some of his doctrines were subversive of all religion. It is said that he explained the origin of religion by the personification of natural objects.

Author Information

The author of this article is anonymous. The IEP is actively seeking an author who will write a replacement article.

Pyrrho (c. 360—c. 270 B.C.E.)

PyrrhoPyrrho was a Greek philosopher from Elis, and founder of the Greek school of skepticism. In his youth he practiced the art of painting, but passed over this for philosophy. He studied the writings of Democritus, became a disciple of Bryson, the son of Stilpo, and later a disciple of Anaxarchus. He took part in the Indian expedition of Alexander the Great, and met with philosophers of the Indus region. Back in Greece he was frustrated with the assertions of the Dogmatists (those who claimed to possess knowledge), and founded a new school in which he taught fallibilism, namely that every object of human knowledge involves uncertainty. Thus, he argued, it is impossible ever to arrive at the knowledge of truth (Diog. Laert, 58). It is related that he acted on his own principles, and carried his skepticism to such an extreme, that his friends were obliged to accompany him wherever he went, so he might not be run over by carriages or fall down precipices. It is likely, though, that these reports were invented by the Dogmatists whom he opposed. He spent a great part of his life in solitude, and was undisturbed by fear, or joy, or grief. He withstood bodily pain, and when in danger showed no sign of apprehension. In disputes he was known for his subtlety. Epicurus, though no friend to skepticism, admired Pyrrho because he recommended and practiced the kind of self-control that fostered tranquillity; this, for Epicurus, was the end of all physical and moral science. Pyrrho was so highly valued by his countrymen that they honored him with the office of chief priest and, out of respect for him, passed a decree by which all philosophers were made immune from taxation. He was an admirer of poets, particularly Homer, and frequently cited passages from his poems. After his death, the Athenians honored his memory with a statue, and a monument to him was erected in his own country.

Pyrrho left no writings, and we owe our knowledge of his thoughts to his disciple Timon of Phlius. His philosophy, in common with all post-Aristotelian systems, is purely practical in its outlook. Skepticism is not posited on account of its speculative interest, but only because Pyrrho sees in it the road to happiness, and the escape from the calamities of life. The proper course of the sage, said Pyrrho, is to ask himself three questions. Firstly we must ask what things are and how they are constituted. Secondly, we ask how we are related to these things. Thirdly, we ask what ought to be our attitude towards them. As to what things are, we can only answer that we know nothing. We only know how things appear to us, but of their inner substance we are ignorant. The same thing appears differently to different people, and therefore it is impossible to know which opinion is right. The diversity of opinion among the wise, as well as among the vulgar, proves this. To every assertion the contradictory assertion can be opposed with equally good grounds, and whatever my opinion, the contrary opinion is believed by somebody else who is quite as clever and competent to judge as I am. Opinion we may have, but certainty and knowledge are impossible. Hence our attitude to things (the third question), ought to be complete suspense of judgment. We can be certain of nothing, not even of the most trivial assertions. Therefore we ought never to make any positive statements on any subject. And the Pyrrhonists were careful to import an element of doubt even into the most trifling assertions which they might make in the course of their daily life. They did not say, "it is so," but "it seems so," or "it appears so to me." Every observation would be prefixed with a "perhaps," or "it may be."

This absence of certainty applies as much to practical as to theoretical matters. Nothing is in itself true or false. It only appears so. In the same way, nothing is in itself good or evil. It is only opinion, custom, law, which makes it so. When the sage realizes this, he will cease to prefer one course of action to another, and the result will be apathy (ataraxia). All action is the result of preference, and preference is the belief that one thing is better than another. If I go to the north, it is because, for one reason or another, I believe that it is better than going to the south. Suppress this belief, learn that the one is not in reality better than the other, but only appears so, and one would go in no direction at all. Complete suppression of opinion would mean complete suppression of action, and it was at this that Pyrrho aimed. To have no opinions was the skeptical maxim, because in practice it meant apathy, total quietism. All action is founded on belief, and all belief is delusion, hence the absence of all activity is the ideal of the sage. In this apathy he will renounce all desires, for desire is the opinion that one thing is better than another. He will live in complete repose, in undisturbed tranquillity of soul, free from all delusions. Unhappiness is the result of not attaining what one desires, or of losing it when attained. The wise person, being free from desires, is free from unhappiness. He knows that, though people struggle and fight for what they desire, vainly supposing some things better than others, such activity is but a futile struggle about nothing, for all things are equally indifferent, and nothing matters. Between health and sickness, life and death, difference there is none. Yet insofar as we are compelled to act, we will follow probability, opinion, custom, and law, but without any belief in the essential validity or truth of these criteria.

Author Information

The author of this article is anonymous. The IEP is actively seeking an author who will write a replacement article.

Roman Philosophy

roman_philosophyRoman philosophy is thoroughly grounded in the traditions of Greek philosophy. Interest in the subject was first excited at Rome in 155 BCE. by an Athenian embassy, consisting of the Academic Carneades, the Stoic Diogenes, and the Peripatetic Critolaus. Of more permanent influence was the work of the Stoic Panaetius, the friend of the younger Scipio and of Laelius; but a thorough study of Greek philosophy was first introduced in the time of Cicero and Varro. In a number of works they tried to make it accessible even to those of their countrymen who were outside the learned circles. Cicero chiefly took it up in a spirit of eclecticism ; but among his contemporaries Epicureanism is represented in the poetical treatise of Lucretius on the nature of things, and Pythagoreanism by Nigidium Figulus. In Imperial times Epicureanism and Stoicism were most popular, especially the latter, as represented by the writings of Seneca, Cornutus, and the emperor Marcus Aurelius; while Eclectic Platonism was taken up by Apuleius of Madaura. One of the latest philosophical writers of antiquity is Boethius, whose writings were the chief source of information as to Greek philosophy during the first centuries of the Middle Ages.

Author Information

The author of this article is anonymous. The IEP is actively seeking an author who will write a replacement article.

Pythagoras (c. 570—c. 495 B.C.E)

PythagorasThe pre-Socratic Greek philosopher Pythagoras must have been one of the world's greatest persons, but he wrote nothing, and it is hard to say how much of the doctrine we know as Pythagorean is due to the founder of the society and how much is later development. It is also hard to say how much of what we are told about the life of Pythagoras is trustworthy; for a mass of legend gathered around his name at an early date. Sometimes he is represented as a man of science, and sometimes as a preacher of mystic doctrines, and we might be tempted to regard one or other of those characters as alone historical. The truth is that there is no need to reject either of the traditional views. The union of mathematical genius and mysticism is common enough. Originally from Samos, Pythagoras founded at Kroton (in southern Italy) a society which was at once a religious community and a scientific school. Such a body was bound to excite jealousy and mistrust, and we hear of many struggles. Pythagoras himself had to flee from Kroton to Metapontion, where he died.

It is stated that he was a disciple of Anaximander, his astronomy was the natural development of Anaximander's. Also, the way in which the Pythagorean geometry developed also bears witness to its descent from that of Miletos. The great problem at this date was the duplication of the square, a problem which gave rise to the theorem of the square on the hypotenuse, commonly known still as the Pythagorean proposition (Euclid, I. 47). If we were right in assuming that Thales worked with the old 3:4:5 triangle, the connection is obvious.

Pythagoras argued that there are three kinds of men, just as there are three classes of strangers who come to the Olympic Games. The lowest consists of those who come to buy and sell, and next above them are those who come to compete. Best of all are those who simply come to look on. Men may be classified accordingly as lovers of wisdom, lovers of honor, and lovers of gain. That seems to imply the doctrine of the tripartite soul, which is also attributed to the early Pythagoreans on good authority, though it is common now to ascribe it to Plato. There are, however, clear references to it before his time, and it agrees much better with the general outlook of the Pythagoreans. The comparison of human life to a gathering like the Games was often repeated in later days. Pythagoras also taught the doctrine of Rebirth or transmigration, which we may have learned from the contemporary Orphics. Xenophanes made fun of him for pretending to recognize the voice of a departed friend in the howls of a beaten dog. Empedocles seems to be referring to him when he speaks of a man who could remember what happened ten or twenty generations before. It was on this that the doctrine of Recollection, which plays so great a part in Plato, was based. The things we perceive with the senses, Plato argues, remind us of things we knew when the soul was out of the body and could perceive reality directly.

There is more difficulty about the cosmology of Pythagoras. Hardly any school ever professed such reverence for its founder's authority as the Pythagoreans. 'The Master said so' was their watchword. On the other hand, few schools have shown so much capacity for progress and for adapting themselves to new conditions. Pythagoras started from the cosmical system of Anaximenes. Aristotle tells us that the Pythagoreans represented the world as inhaling 'air' form the boundless mass outside it, and this 'air' is identified with 'the unlimited'. When, however, we come to the process by which things are developed out of the 'unlimited', we observe a great change. We hear nothing more of 'separating out' or even of rarefaction and condensation. Instead of that we have the theory that what gives form to the Unlimited is the Limit. That is the great contribution of Pythagoras to philosophy, and we must try to understand it. Now the function of the Limit is usually illustrated from the arts of music and medicine, and we have seen how important these two arts were for Pythagoreans, so it is natural to infer that the key to its meaning is to be found in them.

It may be taken as certain that Pythagoras himself discovered the numerical ratios which determine the concordant intervals of the musical scale. Similar to musical intervals, in medicine there are opposites, such as the hot and the cold, the wet and the dry, and it is the business of the physician to produce a proper 'blend' of these in the human body. In a well-known passage of Plato's Phaedo (86 b) we are told by Simmias that the Pythagoreans held the body to be strung like an instrument to a certain pitch, hot and cold, wet and dry taking the place of high and low in music. Musical tuning and health are alike means arising from the application of Limit to the Unlimited. It was natural for Pythagoras to look for something of the same kind in the world at large. Briefly stated, the doctrine of Pythagoras was that all things are numbers. In certain fundamental cases, the early Pythagoreans represented numbers and explained their properties by means of dots arranged in certain 'figures' or patterns.

Author Information

The author of this article is anonymous. The IEP is actively seeking an author who will write a replacement article.

Parmenides (b. 510 B.C.E.)

Parmenides-imgParmenides was a Greek philosopher and poet, born of an illustrious family about B.C.E. 510, at Elea in Lower Italy, and is is the chief representative of the Eleatic philosophy. He was held in high esteem by his fellow-citizens for his excellent legislation, to which they ascribed the prosperity and wealth of the town. He was also admired for his exemplary life. A "Parmenidean life" was proverbial among the Greeks. He is commonly represented as a disciple of Xenophanes. Parmenides wrote after Heraclitus, and in conscious opposition to him, given the evident allusion to Hericlitus: "for whom it is and is not, the same and not the same, and all things travel in opposite directions" (fr. 6, 8). Little more is known of his biography than that he stopped at Athens on a journey in his sixty-fifth year, and there became acquainted with the youthful Socrates. That must have been in the middle of the fifth century BCE., or shortly after it.

Parmenides broke with the older Ionic prose tradition by writing in hexameter verse. His didactic poem, called On Nature, survives in fragments, although the Proem (or introductory discourse) of the work has been preserved. Parmenides was a young man when he wrote it, for the goddess who reveals the truth to him addresses him as "youth." The work is considered inartistic. Its Hesiodic style was appropriate for the cosmogony he describes in the second part, but is unsuited to the arid dialectic of the first. Parmenides was no born poet, and we must ask what led him to take this new departure. The example of Xenophanes' poetic writings is not a complete explanation; for the poetry of Parmenides is as unlike that of Xenophanes as it well can be, and his style is more like Hesiod and the Orphics. In the Proem Parmenides describes his ascent to the home of the goddess who is supposed to speak the remainder of the verses; this is a reflexion of the conventional ascents into heaven which were almost as common as descents into hell in the apocalyptic literature of those days.

The Proem opens with Parmenides representing himself as borne on a chariot and attended by the Sunmaidens who have quitted the Halls of Night to guide him on his journey. They pass along the highway till they come to the Gate of Night and Day, which is locked and barred. The key is in the keeping of Dike (Right), the Avenger, who is persuaded to unlock it by the Sunmaidens. They pass in through the gate and are now, of course, in the realms of Day. The goal of the journey is the palace of a goddess who welcomes Parmenides and instructs him in the two ways, that of Truth and the deceptive way of Belief, in which is no truth at all. All this is described without inspiration and in a purely conventional manner, so it must be interpreted by the canons of the apocalyptic style. It is clearly meant to indicate that Parmenides had been converted, that he had passed from error (night) to truth (day), and the Two Ways must represent his former error and the truth which is now revealed to him.

There is reason to believe that the Way of Belief is an account of Pythagorean cosmology. In any case, it is surely impossible to regard it as anything else than a description of some error. The goddess says so in words that cannot be explained away. Further, this erroneous belief is not the ordinary man's view of the world, but an elaborate system, which seems to be a natural development the Ionian cosmology on certain lines, and there is no other system but the Pythagorean that fulfils this requirement. To this it has been objected that Parmenides would not have taken the trouble to expound in detail a system he had altogether rejected, but that is to mistake the character of the apocalyptic convention. It is not Parmenides, but the goddess, that expounds the system, and it is for this reason that the beliefs described are said to be those of 'mortals'. Now a description of the ascent of the soul would be quite incomplete without a picture of the region from which it had escaped. The goddess must reveal the two ways at the parting of which Parmenides stands, and bid him choose the better. The rise of mathematics in the Pythagorean school had revealed for the first time the power of thought. To the mathematician of all men it is the same thing that can be thought and that can be, and this is the principle from which Parmenides starts. It is impossible to think what is not, and it is impossible for what cannot be thought to be. The great question, Is it or is it not? is therefore equivalent to the question, Can it be thought or not?

In any case, the work thus has two divisions. The first discusses the truth, and the second the world of illusion -- that is, the world of the senses and the erroneous opinions of mankind founded upon them. In his opinion truth lies in the perception that existence is, and error in the idea that non-existence also can be. Nothing can have real existence but what is conceivable; therefore to be imagined and to be able to exist are the same thing, and there is no development. The essence of what is conceivable is incapable of development, imperishable, immutable, unbounded, and indivisible. What is various and mutable, all development, is a delusive phantom. Perception is thought directed to the pure essence of being; the phenomenal world is a delusion, and the opinions formed concerning it can only be improbable.

Parmenides goes on to consider in the light of this principle the consequences of saying that anything is. In the first place, it cannot have come into being. If it had, it must have arisen from nothing or from something. It cannot have arisen from nothing; for there is no nothing. It cannot have arisen from something; for here is nothing else than what is. Nor can anything else besides itself come into being; for there can be no empty space in which it could do so. Is it or is it not? If it is, then it is now, all at once. In this way Parmenides refutes all accounts of the origin of the world. Ex nihilo nihil fit.

Further, if it is, it simply is, and it cannot be more or less. There is, therefore, as much of it in one place as in another. (That makes rarefaction and condensation impossible.) it is continuous and indivisible; for there is nothing but itself which could prevent its parts being in contact with on another. It is therefore full, a continuous indivisible plenum. (That is directed against the Pythagorean theory of a discontinuous reality.) Further, it is immovable. If it moved, it must move into empty space, and empty space is nothing, and there is no nothing. Also it is finite and spherical; for it cannot be in one direction any more than in another, and the sphere is the only figure of which this can be said. What is is, therefore a finite, spherical, motionless, continuous plenum, and there is nothing beyond it. Coming into being and ceasing to be are mere 'names', and so is motion, and still more color and the like. They are not even thoughts; for a thought must be a thought of something that is, and none of these can be.

Such is the conclusion to which the view of the real as a single body inevitably leads, and there is no escape from it. The 'matter' of our physical text-books is just the real of Parmenides; and, unless we can find room for something else than matter, we are shut up into his account of reality. No subsequent system could afford to ignore this, but of course it was impossible to acquiesce permanently in a doctrine like that of Parmenides. It deprives the world we know of all claim to existence, and reduces it to something which is hardly even an illusion. If we are to give an intelligible account of the world, we must certainly introduce motion again somehow. That can never be taken for granted any more, as it was by the early cosmologists; we must attempt to explain it if we are to escape from the conclusions of Parmenides.

Author Information

The author of this article is anonymous. The IEP is actively seeking an author who will write a replacement article.


The Peripatetic doctrines were introduced into Rome along with other Greek philosophies by the embassy of Critolaus, Carneades, and Diogenes, but were little known until the tie of Sylla. Tyrannion the grammarian and Andronicus of Rhodes were the first who brought the writings of Aristotle and Theophrastus into notice. The obscurity of Aristotle's works hindered the success of his philosophy among the Romans. Julius Caesar and Augustus patronized the Peripatetic doctrines. Under Tiberius, Caligula, and Claudius, however, the Peripatetics along with other philosophical schools, were either banished or obliged to remain silent on their views. This was also the case during the greater part of the reign of Nero, although, in the early part of it philosophy was favored. Ammonius the Peripatetic made great efforts to extend the authority of Aristotle, but about this time the Platonists began to study his writings, and prepared the way for the Eclectic Peripatetics under Ammonius Sacas, who flourished about a century after Ammonius the Peripatetic. After the time of Justinian, philosophy in general declined. But in the writings of the scholastics, Aristotle's views predominated. About the 12th century it had many adherents among the Saracens and Jews, particularly in Spain.

Author Information

The author of this article is anonymous. The IEP is actively seeking an author who will write a replacement article.


MenippusMenippus, an adherent of the Cynic School of philosophy, was a Greek philosopher of Gadara in Syria, who flourished about 250 BCE. He was born at Sinope in Asia Minor, but his family was originally from Gadara, in Palestine. According to Diogenes Laertius, he was at first a slave, but afterward obtained his freedom by purchase, and eventually succeeded, by dint of money, in obtaining citizenship at Thebes. Here he pursued the employment of a money lender, and obtained from this the title "one who lends money at daily interest". Having been defrauded, and having lost, in consequence, all his property, he hung himself in despair. Menippus was the author of several works, now completely lost; they satirized the follies of human kind, especially of philosophers, in a sarcastic tone Among other productions, he wrote a piece entitled "The Sale of Diogenes," and another called "Necromancy." They were a medley of prose and verse, and became models for the satirical works of Varro (hence called Saturae Menippeae. It is suggested that the Necromancy inspired an imitator of Lucian to compose the "Menippus, or Oracle of the Dead," which is found among the works of the native of Samosata.

Author Information

The author of this article is anonymous. The IEP is actively seeking an author who will write a replacement article.

Leucippus (5th cn. B.C.E.)

Leucippus was the founder of Atomism. We know next to nothing about his life, and his book appears to have been incorporated in the collected works of Democritus. No writer subsequent to Theophrastos seems to have been able to distinguish his teaching from that of his more famous disciple. Indeed his very existence has been denied, though on wholly insufficient grounds.

Aristotle gives a clear and intelligible account of the way Leucippus' theory arose. It originated from Parmenides' denial of the void, from which the impossibility of multiplicity and motion had been deduced. Leucippus supposed himself to have discovered a theory which would avoid this consequence. He admitted that there could be no motion if there was no void, and he inferred that it was wrong to identify the void with the non-existent. Leucippus was the first philosopher to affirm, with a full consciousness of what he was doing, the existence of empty space. The Pythagorean void had been more or less identified with 'air', but the void of Leucippus was really a vacuum.

Besides space there was body, and to this Leucippus ascribed all the characteristics of Parmenides notion of the real. The assumption of empty space, however, made it possible to affirm that there was an infinite number of such reals, invisible because of their smallness, but each possessing all the marks of the Parmenidean One, and in particular each indivisible like it. These moved in the empty space, and their combinations can give rise to the things we perceive with the senses. Pluralism was at least stated in a logical and coherent way. Democritus compared the motions of the atoms of the soul to that of the particles in the sunbeam which dart hither and thither in all directions even when there is no wind, and we may fairly assume that he regarded the original motion of the other atoms in much the same way.

The atoms are not mathematically indivisible like the Pythagorean monads, but they are physically indivisible because there is no empty space in them. Theoretically, then, there is no reason why an atom should not be as large as a world. Such an atom would be much the same thing as the Sphere of Parmenides, were it not for the empty space outside it and the plurality of worlds. As a matter of fact, however, all atoms are invisible. That does not mean, of course, that they are all the same size; for there is room for an infinite variety of sizes below the limit of the minimum visible. Leucippus explained the phenomenon of weight from the size of the atoms and their combustions, but he did not regard weight itself as a primary property of bodies. Aristotle distinctly says that none of his predecessors had said anything of absolute weight and lightness, but only of relative weight and lightness, and Epicurus was the first to ascribe weight to atoms. Weight for the earlier atomists is only a secondary phenomenon arising, in a manner to be explained, from excess of magnitude. It will be observed that in this respect the early atomists were far more scientific than Epicurus and even than Aristotle. The conception of absolute weight has no place in science, and it is really one of the most striking illustrations of the true scientific instinct of the Greek philosophers that no one before Aristotle ever made use of it, and Plato expressly rejected it.

The first effect of the motion of the atoms is that the larger atoms are retarded, not because they are 'heavy', but because they are more exposed to impact than the smaller. In particular, atoms of an irregular shape become entangled with one another and form groups of atoms, which are still more exposed to impact and consequent retardation. The smallest and roundest atoms, on the other hand, preserve their original motions best, and these are the atoms of which fire is composed. In an infinite void in which an infinite number of atoms of countless shapes and sizes are constantly impinging upon one another in all directions, there will be an infinite number of places where a vortex motion is set up by their impact. when this happens, we have the beginning of a world. It is not correct to ascribe this to chance, as later writers do. It follows necessarily from the presuppositions of the system. The solitary fragment of Leucippus we possess is to the effect that 'Naught happens for nothing, but all things from a ground (logos) and of necessity'.

Author Information

The author of this article is anonymous. The IEP is actively seeking an author who will write a replacement article.

Hippias (fl. 5th cn. B.C.E.)

A Greek sophist of Elis and a contemporary of Socrates. He taught in the towns of Greece, especially at Athens. He had the advantage of a prodigious memory, and was deeply versed in all the learning of his day. He attempted literature in every form which was then extant. He also made the first attempt in the composition of dialogues. In the two Platonic dialogues named after him (Hippias Major and Hippias Minor), he is represented as excessively vain and arrogant.

Hippias is chiefly memorable for his efforts in the direction of universality. He was the enemy of all specialization, and appeared at Olympia gorgeously attired in a costume entirely of his own making down to the ring on his finger. He was prepared to lecture to anyone on anything, from astronomy to ancient history. Such a man had need of a good memory, and we know that he invented a system of mnemonics. There was a more serious side to his character, however. This was the age when people were still optimistic of squaring the circle by a geometrical construction. The lunules of Hippocrates of Chios belong to it, and Hippias, the universal genius, could not be left behind here. He invented the curve still known as the quadratix, which would solve the problem if it could be mechanically described. Hippias appears to have originated the idea of natural law as the foundation of morality, distinguishing nature from the arbitrary conventions or fashions, differing according to the different times or regions in which they arise, imposed by arbitrary human enactment, and often unwillingly obeyed. He held that there is an element of right common to the laws of all countries and constituting their essential basis. He held also that the good and wise of all countries are naturally akin and should regard one another as citizens of a single state. This idea was subsequently developed by the Cynic and still more by the Stoic schools, passing from the latter to the jurists, in whose hands it became the great instrument for converting Roman law into a legislation for a people.

Author Information

The author of this article is anonymous. The IEP is actively seeking an author who will write a replacement article.

Euclides (c. 430—360 B.C.E.)

Euclides was a native of Megara, and founder of the Megarian or Eristic sect. He applied himself early to the study of philosophy, and learned from the writings of Parmenides the art of disputation. Hearing of the fame of Socrates, Euclides moved to Athens and became a devoted student for many years. Because of an enmity between Athenians and Megarians, a decree was passed which forbid any Megarian from entering Athens under the penalty of death. Euclides moved twenty miles out of Athens, and would sneak into the city at night for instruction, dressed as a woman in a long cloak and veil. He frequently became involved in business disputes in civil courts. Socrates, who despised forensic contests, expressed dissatisfaction with Euclides for his fondness for controversy. It is likely that this provoked a separation between Euclides and Socrates, for after this Euclides was the head of a school in Megara which taught the art of disputation. Debates were conducted with so much vehemence among his pupils, that Timon said of Euclides that he carried the madness of contention from Athens of Megara (Diog. Laert, 6:22). Nevertheless, his restraint is attested to in a story about a quarrel he had with his brother. His brother charged, "Let me perish if do not have revenge on you." To this Euclides replied, "And let me perish if I don not subdue your resentment by forbearance, and make you love me as much as ever." In disputes Euclides was averse to the analogical method of reasoning, and judged that legitimate argumentation consists in deducing fair conclusions from acknowledge premises.

His position was a combination of Socraticism and Eleaticism. Virtue is knowledge, but knowledge of what? It is here that the Eleatic influence became visible. With Parmenides, the Megarics believed in the one Absolute being. All multiplicity, all motion, are illusory. The world of sense has in it no true reality. Only Being is. If virtue is knowledge, therefore, it can only be the knowledge of this Being. If the essential concept of Socrates was the Good, and the essential concept of Parmenides Being, Euclides now combined the two. Thus, according to Cicero, he defined the "supreme good" as that which is always the same. The Good is identified with Being. Being, the One, God, Intelligence, providence, the Good, divinity, are merely different names for the same thing. Becoming, the many, evil, are the names of its opposite, not-being. Multiplicity is thus identified with evil, and both are declared illusory. Evil has no real existence. The good alone truly is. The various virtues, as benevolence, temperance, prudence, are merely different names for the one virtue, knowledge of being. It is said that when Euclides was asked his opinion concerning the gods, he replied, "I know nothing more of them than this, that they hate inquisitive persons."

Author Information

The author of this article is anonymous. The IEP is actively seeking an author who will write a replacement article.


greek_coin"Eclecticism" is a name given to a group of ancient philosophers who, from the existing philosophical beliefs, tried to select the doctrines that seemed to them most reasonable, and out of these constructed a new system (see Diogenes Laertius, 21). The name was first generally used in the first century BCE. Stoicism and Epicureanism had made the search for pure truth subordinate to the attainment of practical virtue and happiness. Skepticism had denied that pure truth was possible to discover. Eclecticism sought to reach by selection the highest possible degree of probability, in the despair of attaining to what is absolutely true. In Greek philosophy, the best known Eclectics were the Stoics Panaetius (150 BCE.) and Posidonius (75 BCE.). The New Academic, Carnaedes (155 BCE.), and Philo of Larissa (75 BCE.). Among the Romans, Cicero, whose cast of mind made him always doubtful and uncertain of his own attitude, was thoroughly eclectic, uniting the Peripatetic, Stoic, and New Academic doctrines, and seeking the probable (illud probabile). The same general line was followed by Varro, and in the next century the Stoic Seneca propounded a philosophical system largely based on eclecticism.

In the late period of Greek philosophy there appears an eclectic system consisting of a compromise between the Neo-Pythagoreans and the various Platonic sects. Still another school is that of Philo Iudaeus, who at Alexandria, in the first century CE. interpreted the Old Testament allegorically, and tried to harmonize it with selected doctrines of Greek philosophy. Neo-Platonism, the last product of Greek speculation, was also a fusion of Greek philosophy with eastern religion. Its chief representatives were Plotinus (230 CE.), Porphyrius (275 CE.), Iamblichus (300 CE.), and Proclus (450 CE.). The desire of this school was to attain right relations between God and humans, and was thus religious.

Author Information

The author of this article is anonymous. The IEP is actively seeking an author who will write a replacement article.

Cleanthes (331—232 B.C.E.)

Cleanthes was a Stoic philosopher of Assus in Lydia, and a disciple of Zeno of Citium. After the death of Zeno he presided over his school. He was originally a wrestler, and in this capacity he visited Athens, where he became acquainted with philosophy. Although he possessed no more than four drachma, he was determined to put himself under an eminent philosopher. His first master was Crates, the Academic. He afterward became Zeno's disciple and an advocate of his doctrines. By night he drew water as a common laborer in the public gardens so that he would have leisure to attend lectures in the daytime. The Athenian citizens observed that, although he appeared strong and healthy, he had no visible means of subsistence; they then summoned him before the Areopagas, according to the custom of the city, to give an account of his manner of living. He then produced the gardener for whom he drew water, and a woman for whom he ground meal, as witnesses to prove that he lived by the labor of his hands. The judges of the court were struck with such admiration of his conduct, that they ordered ten minae to be paid him out of the public treasury. Zeno, however, did not allow him to accept it. Antigonus afterward presented him with three thousand minae. From the manner in which this philosopher supported himself, he was called "the well drawer." For many years he was so poor that he was compelled to take notes on Zeno's lectures on shells and bones, since he could not afford to buy better materials. He remained, however, a pupil of Zeno for nineteen years.

His natural faculties were slow. But resolution and perseverance enabled him to overcome all difficulties. At last he became so complete a master of Stoicism that he was perfectly qualified to succeed Zeno. His fellow disciples often ridiculed him for his dullness by calling him an ass. However, his answer was, that if he were an ass he was the better able to bear the weight of Zeno's doctrine. He wrote much, but none of his writings remain except a hymn to Zeus. After his death, the Roman senate erected a statue in honor of him at Assus. It is said that he starved himself to death in his 99th year.

Author Information

The author of this article is anonymous. The IEP is actively seeking an author who will write a replacement article.

Plato: The Academy

greek_vasePhilosophical institution founded by Plato, which advocated skepticism in succeeding generations.

The Academy (Academia) was originally a public garden or grove in the suburbs of Athens, about six stadia from the city, named from Academus or Hecademus, who left it to the citizens for gymnastics (Paus. i. 29). It was surrounded with a wall by Hipparchus, adorned with statues, temples, and sepulchres of illustrious men; planted with olive and plane trees, and watered by the Cephisus. The olive-trees, according to Athenian fables, were reared from layers taken from the sacred olive in the Erechtheum, and afforded the oil given as a prize to victors at the Panathenean festival. The Academy suffered severely during the siege of Athens by Sylla, many trees being cut down to supply timber for machines of war.Few retreats could be more favorable to philosophy and the Muses. Within this enclosure Plato possessed, as part of his patrimony, a small garden, in which he opened a school for the reception of those inclined to attend his instructions. Hence arose the Academic sect, and hence the term Academy has descended to our times. The nameAcademia is frequently used in philosophical writings, especially in Cicero, as indicative of the Academic sect.

Sextus Empiricus enumerates five divisions of the followers of Plato. He makes Plato founder of the first Academy, Aresilaus of the second, Carneades of the third, Philo and Charmides of the fourth, Antiochus of the fifth. Cicero recognizes only two Academies, the Old and the New, and makes the latter commence as above with Arcesilaus. In enumerating those of the old Academy, he begins, not with Plato, but Democritus, and gives them in the following order: Democritus, Anaxagoras, Empedocles, Parmenides, Xenophanes, Socrates, Plato, Speusippus, Xenocrates, Polemo, Crates, and Crantor. In the New, or Younger, he mentions Arcesilaus, Lacydes, Evander, Hegesinus, Carneades, Clitomachus, and Philo (Acad. Quaest. iv. 5). If we follow the distinction laid down by Diogenes, and alluded to above, the Old Academy will consist of those followers of Plato who taught the doctrine of their master without mixture or corruption; the Middle will embrace those who, by certain innovations in the manner of philosophizing, in some measure receded from the Platonic system without entirely deserting it; while the New will begin with those who relinquished the more questionable tenets of Arcesilaus, and restored, in come measure, the declining reputation of the Platonic school.

Views of the New Academy. The New Academy begins with Carnades (i.e. the Third Academy for Diogenes) and was largely skeptical in its teachings. They denied the possibility of aiming at absolute truth or at any certain criterion of truth. Carneades argued that if there were any such criterion it must exist in reason or sensation or conception; but as reason depends on conception and this in turn on sensation, and as we have no means of deciding whether our sensations really correspond to the objects that produce them, the basis of all knowledge is always uncertain. Hence, all that we can attain to is a high degree of probability, which we must accept as the nearest possible approximation to the truth. The New Academy teaching represents the spirit of an age when religion was decaying, and philosophy itself, losing its earnest and serious spirit, was becoming merely a vehicle for rhetoric and dialectical ingenuity. Cicero's speculative philosophy was in the main in accord with the teachings of Carneades, looking rather to the probable (illud probabile) than to certain truth (see his Academica).

Author Information

The author of this article is anonymous. The IEP is actively seeking an author who will write a replacement article.