Category Archives: History Misc.

Philosophy of History

History is the study of the past in all its forms. Philosophy of history examines the theoretical foundations of the practice, application, and social consequences of history and historiography. It is similar to other area studies – such as philosophy of science or philosophy of religion – in two respects. First, philosophy of history utilizes the best theories in the core areas of philosophy like metaphysics, epistemology, and ethics to address questions about the nature of the past and how we come to know it: whether the past proceeds in a random way or is guided by some principle of order, how best to explain or describe the events and objects of the past, how historical events can be considered causally efficacious on one another, and how to adjudicate testimony and evidence. Second, as is the case with the other area-studies, philosophy of history investigates problems that are unique to its subject matter. History examines not what things are so much as how they came to be. History focuses on the unique rather than the general. Its movers are most often people who act for a variety of inner motives rather than purely physical forces. Its objects are no longer observable directly, but must be mediated by evidence. These problems and many more that are specific to the past have been studied and debated for as long as philosophy itself has existed.

This article presents the history of philosophy of history from Ancient Greece to the present, with particular emphases on the variety of 19th century philosophy of history and on the divide between continental and Anglophone or analytic philosophy of history in the 20th century.

Table of Contents

  1. Ancient through Medieval
  2. Humanism through Renaissance
  3. Enlightenment through Romanticism
  4. 19th Century Teleological Systems
  5. 19th Century Scientific Historiography
  6. 19th Century Post-Kantian Historiography
  7. 20th Century Continental
  8. 20th Century Anglophone
  9. Contemporary
  10. References and Further Reading
    1. Classical Works in English Translation
    2. Prominent Scholarship and Collections

1. Ancient through Medieval


The attempt to derive meaning from the past is as old as culture itself. The very notion of a culture depends upon a belief in a common history that members of that culture recognize themselves as meaningfully sharing. Whether it be an interpretation of events as products of divine intervention or whether it be the secular uniting of families or of nations, history has always been a sort of glue for a culture’s fabric.

Arguably the first scientific philosophy of history—which is characterized by an attempt to be non-biased, testimony-based, comprehensive, and unencumbered by grand predictive structures— was produced by the father of history, Herodotus (c. 484-425 BCE). The word ‘history’ derives from his usage of historía to define his ‘inquiries’ or ‘researches’: “Herodotus of Halicarnassus, his inquiries are here set down to preserve the memory of the past by putting on record the marvelous achievements both of the Greek and non-Greek peoples; and more particularly, to show how the two races came into conflict” (Herodotus, Histories I.1,1). To attain his comprehensive characterization of the Greek and non-Greek worlds, Herodotus’ research depended on the often fabulous oral traditions of his predecessors. But what he sacrifices in confirmable fact he makes up for in the descriptive vividness of everyday life. All stories, however preposterous, are recorded without moral judgment since they each reflect the beliefs of a time and of a people, all of which are worth knowing.

While Greece and Rome produced a number of important historians and chroniclers, none were more comprehensive or more influential than Thucydides (c.460-c.395 BCE). Like Herodotus, Thucydides viewed history as a source of lessons about how people tended to act. And like him, too, Thucydides was concerned with how methodological considerations shaped our view of the past. However, Thucydides was critical of Herodotus for having failed to carry out a sufficiently objective account. “To hear this history told, insofar as it lacks all that is fabulous, shall perhaps not be entirely pleasing. But whoever desires to investigate the truth of things done, and which according to the character of mankind may be done again, or at least approximately, will discover enough to make it worthwhile” (Thucydides, The Peloponnesian War I, 22). To remedy Herodotus’ uncritical record, first, Thucydides restricted his inquiry to the main actors of the Peloponnesian War: the generals and governors who decided what was to be done rather than the everyday people who could only speculate about it. The lesson to be learned was not the sheer diversity of cultural behaviors but the typological character of agents and their actions, which was to serve as a sort of guide to future conduct since they were likely to repeat themselves. Second, Thucydides treated his evidence with overt skepticism. He claims to not accept hearsay or conjecture, and to admit only that which he had personally seen or else had been confirmed by multiple reliable sources. Thucydides was the first to utilize source criticism in documentary evidence. The lengthy and eloquent speeches he ascribes to various parties are preserved only under the promise that they follow as closely as possible the intention of their alleged speaker.

With the waning of classical antiquity came the decline of the scientific paradigm of history. The religious practice of sacred-history in the Judeo-Christian and Islamic worlds, though often interpreting the same key events in very different ways, share common meta-historical principles. The past is not studied for the sake of disinterested truth, but in the hope of attaining a glimpse of the bond between the divine plan and a given people’s course in the world. In that sense, many non-fundamentalist historians of each faith regard their sacred texts as meaningful documents meant for consideration in the light of the present and what its authors believe to be our common future. Under the surface chronicle of events like floods, plagues, good harvests, or benevolent rulers is seen a moral and spiritual lesson provided by god to his people, which it is the historian’s task to relate. As the Qur’an makes clear, “In their history, there is a lesson [‘ibra] for those who possess intelligence” (Qu’ran 12:111).

The most reflective of the early medieval historiographers is doubtless Augustine (354-430). In opposition to Thucydides’ aim to show the repeatability of typical elements from the past, Augustine’s emphasized the linearity of history as a part of the Christian eschatology, the necessary unfolding of God’s eternal plan within a temporally-ordered course of history. His City of God (413-26) characterizes lives and nations as a long redemption from original sin that culminates in the appearance of Christ. Since then, history has been a record of the engaged struggle between the chosen elect of the City of God and the rebellious self-lovers who dwell in the City of Men. Because time is linear, its key events are unique and inviolable: the Fall of Adam, the Birth and Death of Jesus, and the Resurrection all move history along to the Final Judgment with infallible regularity.

Sacred-history thus tends to provide an overarching narrative about the meaning of human existence, either as a tragedy or a statement of hope in a redeemed future. Besides its canonical status throughout much of the Medieval world, its influence manifestly stretches over the hermeneutical tradition as well as the teleological philosophers of history of the Nineteenth Century.

2. Humanism through Renaissance

Petrarch’s (1304-1374) De secreto conflict curarum mearum (c.1347-c.1353) argued that secular intellectual pursuits, among them history, need not be spiritually hazardous. His circle of followers recovered and restored a mass of ancient texts the likes of which the previous millennium had not imagined, among them the histories of Cicero, Livy, Tacitus, and Varro. At the beginning of the 15th century, humanist universities expanded from their scholastic core to include rhetoric, poetry, and above all, history. And with their greater concern for the things and people of the natural world came an increasing focus on political history rather than grand religious narratives. Accordingly, the common focal point was not the Resurrection of Christ, but the fall of Rome. And here the lesson of history was not a consistent moral decline, but a hope that understanding Ancient models of social and political life would make room for a sort of secular golden age.

With the new focus on human affairs, there came an increased attention to written records and natural evidence. Armed with newly unlocked troves of secular literary artifacts, the works of Leonardo Bruni (c.1370-1444) and Flavio Biondo (1392-1463) contain the first forays into modern source criticism and demands for documentary evidence. And for Bruni’s History of the Florentine People (1415-39), the story to be told was neither a spiritual nor a moral one, but a natural history of the progress of political freedom in Florence.

Though less nationalistic than these, Erasmus, too, demanded that historians trace their sources back to the originals, not just in government documents but in cultural artifacts as well. And that meant investigating the religious spirit of sacred history with the tools of Renaissance humanism. His Latin and Greek translations of the New Testament are monuments of scholarly historiography, and became instrumental for the Reformation. History, for Erasmus, became a tool for critiquing modern misinterpretations and abuses of the once noble past and a means for uncovering the truth about long-misunderstood people, ideas, and events.

But although previous writers of history were reflective about their enterprise, the first to merit the name Philosopher of History is Giambattista Vico (1668-1744). He is the first to argue for a common historical process that guides the course of peoples and nations. In the Scienza Nuova, he writes:

Our Science therefore comes to describe at the same time an ideal eternal history traversed in time by the history of every nation in its rise, progress, maturity, decline, and fall. Indeed we go so far as to assert that whoever mediates this Science tells himself this ideal eternal history only so far as he makes it by that proof, ‘it had, has, and will have to be’. For the first indubitable principle above posited is that this world of nations has certainly been made by men, and its guise must therefore be found within the modifications of our own human mind. And history cannot be more certain than when he who creates the things also describes them. (Vico 1948, 104)

Vico’s philosophy of history follows from his epistemological postulate that to know something fully required understanding how it came to be. The true is precisely that which has been made, expressed in his Latin as Verum esse ipsum factum. Since natural objects were not made by the scientists who study them, their nature must remain to some degree mysterious. But human history, since its objects and its investigators are one and the same, has in principle a methodological advantage. That division between the natural sciences and human sciences was in conscious contradistinction to Descartes’ methodological universalism; and it would become crucial for 19th century Post-Kantian philosophers of history and, later, for the British Idealists.

Vico also suggests that the cultured minds of his day were of a different order than those of their primitive ancestors. Whereas his 18th century thinkers form abstract concepts and universal propositions, to the primitive individual images and sounds directly indicate the real things to which they refer. While for Post-Kantian philosophers lightning is a symbol or metaphor for Zeus, to Vico’s poetic imaginers the lightning really is Zeus. To perfectly reconstruct both their mentality and their history by the principles of rationalist science or enlightenment historiography  is impossible. A new science of the imagination is required, one that can symbolically recapture past people’s forms of thoughts and re-embody their emotions.

Because of these epistemological views, Vico is the first to posit distinct epochs of history in which all nations evolve due to an overarching scheme of logic. Each stage of a nation’s development produces a newly-believed system of natural law, use of language, and institution of government. It is ‘providence’ that causes the transition in every nation from an Age of Gods, wherein people believe themselves directly governed by divine signs and spoke only in a direct object language, to an Age of Heroes wherein aristocrats hold commoners in thrall by their natural superiority and speak in metaphoric images, and then to an Age of Men, wherein people communicate with abstract generalities and assume both a general equality in their social associations and an abstract notion of justice by which they are governed. It is our fate as human beings in every nation to live out this ‘corso’ of history, this progression of mental capacities from fantasia to riflessione.

Ultimately the ideal epoch of reason and civilization is never reached. At our most civilized, history circles back upon itself in a ‘ricorso’ to a ‘second barbarism’. Here in this barbarism of reflection, aided by civil bureaucracy, deceitful language, and cunning reason, our passions are unrestrained by the manners and customs prominent in the Ages of Gods or Heroes to the point that civil society collapses upon itself before returning to a second cycle of history.

3. Enlightenment through Romanticism

In contrast to Vico’s pessimism, the philosophy of history in the 18th century is continuous with the Enlightenment ideals of moral progress and the power of reason. Voltaire’s (1694-1778) Essay on the Customs and the Spirit of the Nations (1756), wherein the phrase ‘philosophy of history’ is supposed to have been coined, was the first attempt since Herodotus to write a comprehensive history of world culture in a non-Christian and non-teleological framework. Social and cultural history replaced military and political history with a trans-religious and trans-European tenor intended to showcase the spiritual and moral progress of humanity. To further rid Europe of what he considered Christian biases, on display especially in the modern eschatology of Jacques Bénigne Bossuet (1627-1704), Voltaire was the first major modern thinker to stress Arab contributions to world culture. In keeping with the Enlightenment, he believed that the best remedy for intolerance and prejudice was simply the truth, something which is best discovered by the objective historian working with original documents, never by the ideologue repeating the dicta of authorities. But for his apologies for non-biased historiography, Voltaire betrays rather clearly the ideals of his age. Differences between the Christian eschatological worldview and his own age’s rationalist science are regarded summarily as improvements, whereas the medieval destruction of the ancient clearly represents decline. The age of reason is, for Voltaire, the standard by which other eras and peoples are to be judged, though few could be said to have reached.

Antoine-Nicolas de Condorcet (1743-1794) openly embraced Enlightenment progressivism. Like Voltaire, his Sketch for a Historical Picture of the Progress of the Human Mind (published posthumously in 1795) viewed the past as a progress of reason, but was more optimistic about the inevitable progress of liberal ideals such as free speech, democratic government, and the equity of suffrage, education, and wealth. The point of history was not only a description of this progress. Because the progress is lawful and universal, history is also predictive and, what is more, articulates a duty for political institutions to work toward the sort of equalities that the march of history would bring about anyway. The historian is no mere critic of his time, but also a herald of what is to come. Widely influential on the French Revolution, Condorcet also made a significant impression on the systematizing philosophies of history of Saint-Simon, Hegel, and Marx, as well as laid the first blueprints for systematic study of social history made popular by Comte, Weber, and Durkheim.

Less revolutionary was Immanuel Kant’s (1724-1804) Idea of a Universal History from a Cosmopolitan Point of View (1784). Kant begins from the Enlightenment view of history as a progressive march of reason and freedom. But given his epistemology he could not presume, as did Voltaire and Condorcet, that the teleological progression of history was empirically discernible within the past. It is not a demonstrable fact, but a necessary condition for the meaningfulness of the past to posit teleological progress as a regulative idea that allows us to justify the many apparent evils that have sprung up within history despite the overall benevolent character of creation. The wars, famines, and natural disasters that pervade history should be seen as nature’s instruments, guiding people into the kinds of civil relationships that eventually maximize freedom and justice. History reveals human culture as the means by which nature accomplishes its state of perpetual peace in all the spiritual pursuits of mankind.

Johann Gottfried Herder (1744-1803) was key in the general turn from Enlightenment historiography to the romantic. His Ideas toward a Philosophy of History of Humanity (1784-91) echoes Vico’s contention that there is no single faculty of human reason for all peoples at all times, but different forms of rationality for various cultures as determined by their particular time and place in the world. Accepting Vico’s notion of necessary development, he nevertheless rejects the Enlightenment emphasis on rationality and freedom as its measures. Herder also discards the Enlightenment tendency to judge the past by the light of the present, irrespective of how rational we consider ourselves today. This results from his fundamental conviction that each national culture is of equal historical value. The same inner vitalism of nature guides all living things on the regular path from birth to death. Just as childhood and old age are essential to the development of the person, are valuable in their own right, and thus should not be judged as somehow inferior from the standpoint of adulthood, so too a nation’s character is of inviolable worth and essential to the development of the whole.

Herder not only rejected Kant’s Enlightenment universalism, but also the epistemological means by which an understanding of ancient people can be reached. It was clear that there could be no empirical proof or rationalist demonstration of the organic pattern of the development Herder finds. Nor, however, should we posit teleological progress as a merely regulative principle of reason. The sense for past people and cultures is not itself communicated whole and entire through their documents in such a way that would be open to historical analysis or source criticism. The historian only apprehends the real spirit of a people through a sympathetic understanding – what Herder calls Einfühlen— of their inner life by analogy with her own. The historian ‘feels her way into’ a people and an age, in order to try to sympathetically apprehend why they made the choices they did.

Romantic historiographers were strongly guided by Herder’s idea that the definition of a people lay more in its inner spirit than its legal borders. The fairy tales of the Grimm brothers (1812), as much as the nationalistic histories of Macaulay (1800-1859), the Wilhelm Tell (1804) saga of Friedrich Schiller (1759-1805), J.W.v. Goethe’s (1749-1832) Goetz von Berlichingen (1773), the transcription of the Beowulf epic (1818), and the surge of histories asserting the sanctity of minority Russio-slavic cultures like the Estonian Kalevipoeg (1853) or the Armenian Sasuntzi Davit (1873) each sought to revitalize and unify present culture under the banner of a shared past. The Romantics followed Herder, too, in their belief that this national character was not discernible solely by meticulous analysis of documents and archival records. The historian must have an overarching sense of the course of history of a people, just as the dramaturge reveals the unity of a character through each individual episode. Hardly a bare chronicle of disconnected facts, the narratives historians tell about the past should communicate a sense of spirit rather than objective information. And only those who ‘breathe the air of a people or an age’ have the proper sort of sympathetic understanding to interpret it correctly. The potential abuses of historiography, to which this nationalistic romanticism lends itself, had a decisive impact on the three main streams of philosophy of history in the 19th century.

4. 19th Century Teleological Systems

The name of G.W.F. Hegel (1770-1831) is nearly synonymous with philosophy of history in two senses, both captured by his phrase, “The only thought which philosophy brings with it, in regard to history, is the simple thought of Reason—the thought that Reason rules the world, and that world history has therefore been rational in its course” (Hegel 1988, 12f). History unfolds itself according to a rational plan; and we know this precisely because the mind which examines it unfolds itself from the first inklings of sense-certainty to absolute knowing in a regular teleological pattern. The same process that governs the movement of history also governs the character of the philosophical speculation inherent in that moment of history. And at the present epoch of philosophical speculation we are capable of understanding the entire movement of history as a rational process unfolding an ever greater awareness of rational freedom. A true account of the whole of reality, which is itself the sole endeavor of philosophy, must consider everything real as real insofar as it can be comprehended by reason as it unfolds within its necessary historical course. Reason is, for Hegel, the real. Both are understood as historical.

Hegel’s lecture series on the Introduction to the Philosophy of History (published posthumously in 1837) is a sort of secular eschatology, wherein the course of reality is considered a single epochal evolution toward a providential end. This is cognized by an increasingly unfolding awareness according to that same plan. As he demotes religion to a subservient place to absolute knowing in his Phenomenology of Spirit (1807), so too does Hegel replace the sacred-history conception of grace with the phenomenological unfolding of reason.

Hegel’s view of the common structural unveiling of reason and history leads to specific consequences for his teleological historiography. Reason consists in both the awareness of contradiction and its sublimation by means of the speculative act of synthesis which results in an increased self-recognition. Analogously, the development of history consists in a progressive structure of oppositions and their necessary synthetic sublimations which leads to an ever increasing self-awareness of freedom. That necessary movement is illustrated in his account of three distinct epochs of world history. In the ancient orient, only the despot is free; his freedom consists only in the arbitrary savagery of his will. The people are held in bondage by the identity of state and religion. The opposition of the despot and his subjects is to some degree overcome by the classical Greek and Roman recognition of citizenship, under which the free individual understands himself to be bound by honor over and above the laws of the state. Still, the great many in the classical world are still un-free. It is only in the intertwining of the Christian recognition of the sanctity of life and the modern liberal definition of morality as inherently intersubjective and rational that guarantees freedom for all. “It was first the Germanic Peoples, through Christianity, who came to the awareness that every human is free by virtue of being human, and that the freedom of spirit comprises our most human nature” (Hegel 1988, 21).

The critics of Hegel have been as passionate as his disciples. Of the former we may count Thomas Carlyle (1795-1881) and the historical school at Basel: J.J. Bachofen (1815-1887), Jacob Burckhardt (1818-1897), and a younger Friedrich Nietzsche (1844-1900). What unites them is a shared belief that historiography should highlight rather than obscure the achievements of individuals under the banner of necessary rational progress, a general ridicule of any historical process which brings about providential ends in the face of overwhelming global suffering, an anti-statist political stance, and a disavowal of progress as coextensive with the expansion of social welfare, intellectualism, and utility. Past epochs were not merely some preparatory ground on the way to the comfortably modern Hegelian or Marxist state, but stand on their own as inherently superior cultures and healthier models of culture life. For Bachofen and Nietzsche, this meant the ancient Greeks, for Burckhardt the aristocrats of the Italian Renaissance. So too ought the remarkable individuals of these eras be seen as fully-willed heroes rather than as Hegelian ‘world-historical individuals’ who appear only when the world process requires a nudge in the direction that providence had already chosen apart from them.

Of the latter group, we may count his disciples both on the left and the right, and prominent theorists of history like Ludwig Feuerbach (1804-1872), David Friedrich Strauss (1808-1874), Eduard von Hartmann (1842-1906), Max Stirner (1806-1856), Georg Lukács (1885-1971), Arnold Toynbee (1889-1975), Herbert Marcuse (1898-1979), Alexandre Kojève (1902-1968), and Theodor Adorno (1903-1969). Most recently the general outline of Hegel’s philosophy of history has been adopted in Francis Fukuyama's (1952—) controversial The End of History (1992).

But without question the most important philosophical engagement with Hegel’s historiography is that of Karl Marx (1818-1883), whose own account of the past is often considered a sort of ‘upside-down’ version of Hegel’s Weltprozess. Even while Marx maintains Hegel’s belief in dialectical progress and historical inevitability, he supplants his speculative method with a historical materialism that views the transitions of epochs in terms of the relationship between production and ownership. Marx’s account of the past has obviously had pervasive political and economic influences; but his philosophy of history has also won many modern and contemporary adherents among a wide number of practicing historians, who regard material conditions as opposed to motivational conditions, as sufficient for historical explanation.

5. 19th Century Scientific Historiography



Perhaps the most common complaint against the Hegelians was that their speculative systems overlooked the empirical facts of history. This explains to some degree the partition, new to the 19th century, between philosophers of history and practicing historians, who were themselves often quite reflective on the philosophical issues of their discipline. Friedrich August Wolf (1759-1824), the first to enter the ranks of the German academy as a classical philologist, was exemplary in this respect. Though more focused on religious and romantic historians, Wolf rejected teleological systems generally by his demand that interpretation be grounded in the combination of a comprehensive sense for the contextual whole of a particular epoch and rigorous attention to the details of textual evidence. Wolf’s 1795 Prolegomena zu Homer is a landmark in source criticism and the first modern attempt to treat history as a genuine science.

While the Romantic historians tried to coopt the intuitive and holistic aspects of Wolf, the influence of his methodological rigor was shared by two rival schools of thought about the possibility of knowledge in antiquity: the Sprachphilologen and the Sachphilologen. J.G.J. Hermann (1772-1848), led the Sprachphilologen in Leipzig along with his followers Karl Lachmann (1793-1851) and Moritz Haupt (1808-1874). For them, knowledge of antiquity concerns principally its verifiability conditions. Since any claim about what Plato, Euripides, or Caesar ‘meant’ requires an evidenced demonstration of their actual words, the philologist’s task should be concerned principally with affixing an as-perfect-as-possible edition of their text. In the 21st century, the legacy of Sprachphilologie can be seen in the tradition of a ‘critical edition’ of an author’s work. The Sachphilologen accepted the demand for critical rigor, but rejected that our knowledge of antiquity should be restricted to written texts. August Boeckh (1785-1867), F.G. Welcker (1784-1868), and Karl Otfried Müller (1797-1840) took seriously the critical methods of Wolf, but cast a wider net in order to incorporate the artifacts, art, and culture. If rigorous proof was sacrificed thereby, then it was repaid by a more comprehensive sense of the genuine life of antiquity. Although sometimes underappreciated by historians of historiography, this debate gave rise to two sets of pervasively influential fields: Sprachphilologie’s demand for rigorous evidence was a forerunner of ‘scientific’ historiography in the mid-19th and 20th centuries; Sachphilologie’s holism laid the groundwork for serious work in archeology, anthropology, numismatics, epigraphy, and a number of other historical disciplines.

What Wolf did for philology, Leopold von Ranke (1795-18860) did for historiography generally. Although arguably exaggerated, his famous claim that historians should not interpret the past subjectively but re-present it wie es eingentlich gewesen ist, or ‘as it really was’, became the rallying cry for practicing historians to reject both the Hegelian system building and the Romantic narratives. And where Wolf sought the scientific character of history in the demonstrability of its evidence, Ranke and propagators such as Heinrich von Sybel (1817-1895) sought it in the disinterested character of its researchers. The historian should be like a clear mirror of the past, absent the biases, political aims, and religious zealotry that distort the image of the real and genuine past. In opposition to the Hegelian and Marxist ranking of ages according to some a priori criterion, Ranke sided with Herder in believing ‘every age is next to God’. To prevent prejudice and hasty generalizations, the historian must not settle for hearsay, but work intensively with official documents and archival records.

In the 20th century, however, and by figures as diverse as E.H. Carr (1892-1982) and Walter Benjamin (1892-1940), Ranke’s hope for empirical objectivity had been characterized as naïvely realist or else as an ironic example of how Western, Christian, economically privileged, and male perspectives masquerade as objectivity. The French Annales School, led by Fernand Braudel (1902-1985), sought to meet these challenges while restoring the Rankean vision of objective historiography.

The mid-1800’s saw another group of historical theorists emerge who were concerned principally to show that the scientific character of historiography concerned its use of the same logic of explanation utilized by the natural scientists. Auguste Comte (1798-1857), founder of positivism, considered history to be a sort of ‘social physics’, which limited explanation to relations among observable phenomena. Any claims to apprehend the ‘real essences’ behind the empirical data was prohibited as a foray into speculative metaphysics. Through empirical inquiry alone we can discover the natural laws that govern historical change. Henry Thomas Buckle’s (1821-1862) History of Civilization in England (1857) made clear that these laws could neither be divined philosophically nor with theological suppositions about divine providence, but could be described statistically in keeping with the empirical methods of the natural sciences.

The most comprehensive advance in the logic of historical inquiry came at this time from John Stuart Mill (1806-1873). Even while he rejected Jeremy Bentham’s (1748-1832) overly reductive hypothesis that all humans are guided simply by pleasure and pain, he maintained the possibility of discovering behavioral laws that would allow us to deduce the meaning of particular actions and predict the future with at least some degree of certainty:

[T]he uniformities of co-existence obtaining among phenomena which are effects of causes, must (as we have so often observed) be corollaries from the laws of causation by which these phenomena are really determined. […] The fundamental problem, therefore, of the social science, is to find the laws according to which any state of society produces the states which succeeds it and takes its place. (Mill 1843, 631)

Despite constraining their explanations to the empirical, many positivists held the belief that history was progressing as a necessary lawful order in terms of both its moral and intellectual development. Comte’s “law of three stages,” for example, held that the human mind and by extension the cultural institutions that result from it follow a strict progression from a ‘theological’ view of things, to the ‘metaphysical’, and finally to the ‘scientific’. Critics have charged that Comte is in this way little better than Hegel in positing an overarching structure to events and a certain zealotry about human progress. Nevertheless, Comte’s insistence that empirical laws are deducible from and predictive of human behavior has had decisive influence in the development of sociology and social psychology, especially in the writing of Émile Durkheim (1858-1917) and Max Weber (1864-1920), as well as upon 20th century explanatory positivism.

6. 19th Century Post-Kantian Historiography


Also in conscious opposition to the Hegelians stood the Post-Kantians Wilhem Dilthey (1833-1911), William Windelband (1848-1915), and Heinrich Rickert (1863-1936). Their shared exhortation – ‘back to Kant!’– involved the recognition, absent in both the practicing historians and in the positivists, that knowledge was necessarily mediated by the pre-given structures of the subject of knowing.

Dilthey’s lifelong and never-finalized project was to provide for the ‘human sciences’ – Geisteswissenschaften – what Kant had for metaphysics: a programmatic schemata of the possible logical forms of inquiry such that the necessarily true could be separated from both the arbitrary and the speculative. This involved his supposition that all expressed historical agency is a manifestation of one of three classes of mental states: judgments, actions, and expressions of experience. To understand the working of history is to understand how this trio – described as an inner Lebenszusammenhang – is exercised in all the empirically observable features of the human world. An advantage over the natural scientist’s explanation of physical objects, this descriptive understanding is aided by the analogies we might draw with the understanding of our own inner experiences. We have an inherent sort of sympathetic awareness of historical events since the agents involved in them are psychologically motivated in ways not wholly dissimilar to ourselves.

Windelband took up Dilthey’s suggestions about the differences between history and other sciences on the question of values to forge his own methodological distinction between erklären and verstehen, explanation and understanding. The biggest difference was not just that history involved values, but that the very means by which we come to our knowledge about the past differs from that by which we explain objects external to us. Science deals in invariable laws, in generalities, and considers its individual objects only insofar as they are instances of their classes. For the historian, however, it is the particular that requires examination: Caesar not as an instance of some general rule about how emperors behave, but as a unique, unrepeatable phenomenon distinct from Alexander, Charlemagne, and Ying Zheng. And from particulars alone general laws cannot be formed. In this way, history is ideographic and  descriptive rather than nomothetic or law-positing, and as such, more concerned to describe and understand than to explain.

Heinrich Rickert accepted Windelband’s methodological distinction as well as Dilthey’s attempt to provide the outlines of a distinctively historical logic. But Rickert stressed, more than they, the psychological dimension of historiography. What an historian held as interesting, or what they choose to present of the practical infinity of possible historical inquiries, was not a matter of reason but a psychology of value. And because historiography was value-driven, any attempt to excise its subjective foundation was not only unwarranted but impossible. These practical interests do not force history to resolve into a merely relativistic narrativity, Rickert thought, since human nature was sufficiently uniform to allow for inter-subjectively compelling accounts even if there is never proof in the positivist sense.

The direct influence of post-Kantian philosophy of history is not as pronounced as the teleological or scientific. But the notion that history is a unique sort of inquiry with its own methodology, logic of explanation, and standards of adjudication has been echoed in various ways by figures from Benedetto Croce (1866-1952) and Georg Simmel (1858-1918), to R. G. Collingwood (1889-1943) and Michael Oakeshott (1901-1990); so too has Dilthey’s search for the cognitive and psychological conditions for historical inquiry been taken up by Ernst Cassirer (1874-1945) and by the Frankfurt School of Critical Theory. The hermeneutics of Hans-Georg Gadamer (1900-2002) are in some respects a critical engagement with the Post-Kantian attempt to recover the past as it was apart from the ‘historically conditioned consciousness’ (wirkungsgeschichtliches Bewußtsein) that predetermines our approach to particular texts and, ultimately, the past as a whole. 

7. 20th Century Continental

As diverse as continental philosophy has been, it would not be an unwarranted generalization to say that all thinkers and schools have in one way or another been focused on history. And they have mostly been so in terms of two distinct conceptual foci: historicity and narrativity.

It was Nietzsche’s On the Uses and Disadvantages of History for Life (1874) that first called into question not just how we could obtain knowledge of the past, but whether and to what extent our attempt to know the past is itself a life-enhancing or life-enervating activity. As human beings, we are unique in the animal world insofar as we are constantly burdened with our pasts as well as our futures, unable to forget those incidents which it would be otherwise preferable to bury on the one hand, and unable to ignore what must become of us on the other. History is not just something we study objectively, but an experience through which we must live and by which we seemingly without conscious control burden ourselves for a variety of psychological reasons.

Martin Heidegger’s (1889-1976) Being and Time (1927) attempts to give a comprehensive analysis to this experience. His overarching project is to answer the question ‘what is Being?’ But in doing so, he recognizes that the truth about Being, that is, our openness to the question of Being, has been gradually covered over in the history of philosophy. From the Presocratics, when the question of the meaning of being was at its most open, to the nihilistic academic age of the 20th century, philosophical history becomes a history of the meaning of Being. The end of philosophy, wherein the specialized sciences have entirely preoccupied themselves with particular beings while summarily ignoring Being itself, beckons a new and intrinsically historical engagement. Accordingly, Heidegger’s own historiography of philosophy is a working-back from this modern dead-end in the hopes of reopening the question of Being itself.

Heidegger’s historiography is, however, more than just an academic recitation of what various other philosophers have said. Human beings, what Heidegger famously terms Dasein, are characterized above all by their ‘being there’ in the world, their ‘thrown-ness’ in existence, which entails as it did for Nietzsche their relation to Being itself in terms of both their pasts and their existential march toward the common future horizon: death. The self as Dasein is constantly engaged in the project of coming out of its past and moving into its future as the space of possibilities in which alone it can act. As such an inextricable part of the human person is its historical facticity.

The existential dimension of Heidegger’s conception of historicity had a profound influence on figures like Martin Buber (1878-1965), Karl Jaspers (1883-1969), Hannah Arendt (1906-1975), Emmanuel Levinas (1906-1995), Jan Patočka (1907-1977), and Paul Ricouer (1913-2005). Jean Paul Sartre (1905-1980), in particular, focused on the existential aspects of the past, which he conceives in terms of a blend of the Marxist material conditions for human action and a quasi psycho-analytic unfolding of the phenomenological self. Man is an historical praxis, for Sartre, a continual project that is both being produced by its past and producing its future in a way that will determine that future person’s possibilities and limits. Sartre’s well-known conception of authenticity is intrinsically historical insofar as it involves the recognition of our personal freedom in the context of the material conditions history imposes upon us. Albeit in less existential terms, the Frankfurt School also founded their view of the subject and of the world in a combination of Marxist materialist historiography and psycho-analysis.


In the latter decades of the 20th century, continental philosophy of history turned its attention to epistemological questions about historical narrative. Again Nietzsche’s reflections on history are a crucial influence, especially his contention that truth is no straightforward or objective correspondence between the world and the proposition but a historically contingent outcome of the continuous struggle between the interests of interpreters. As such, philosophy must concern itself with an historical investigation of how these truth practices function within and against the backdrop of their historical facticities.

Michel Foucault (1926-1984) characterized his own project as the historical investigation of the means of truth production. His earlier work is characterized by what he calls ‘archeology’. His History of Madness (1961) begins a series of works that denies a single fixed meaning for phenomena, but undertakes to show how meaning transmogrifies over time through a series of cultural practices. In The Order of Things (1966), archeology is characterized as a description of the transitions between cultural discourses in a way that highlights their structural and contextual meaning while undermining any substantive notion of the author of those discourses. Foucault’s later work, though he never repudiates his archeological method, is characterized as a ‘genealogy’. The effort, again roughly Nietzschean, is to understand the past in terms of the present, to show that the institutions we find today are neither the result of teleological providence nor an instantiation of rational decision making, but emerge from a power play of discourses carried over from the past. This does not mean that history should study the ‘origins’ of those practices; on the contrary it denies the notion of origin as an illegitimate abstraction from what is a continuous interaction of discourses. History should instead concern itself with those moments when the contingencies of the past emerge or descend out of the conflict of its discourses, with how the past reveals a series of disparities rather than progressive steps.

The conception of history as a play of power-seeking discursive practices was reflected back upon the practices of the historian. A row of postmodern philosophers such as Roland Barthes (1915-1980), Paul de Man (1919-1983), Jean-François Lyotard (1924-1988), Gilles Deleuze (1925-1995), Philippe Lacoue-Labarthe (1940-2007), and Jacques Derrida (1930-2004) came to view not just the events of history but also the writing of history to be necessarily colored by power-based subjectivity. This power play crystallizes in the meta-narrative structures grafted upon the world by the philosophers of history. Indeed, Lyotard’s The Postmodern Condition (1979) characterizes the entire postmodern project as “incredulity toward meta-narratives” (Lyotard 1984, xxiv). With respect to philosophy of history, this entails rejecting both the grand Hegelian ‘master discourse’ about progress and also the Enlightenment categories of generalization from which moral lessons are supposed to be derivable. Rather than a dialectical logic that would seek unity among past events, the postmodern condition drives us to see the disjointedness, dissimilarity, and diversity of events and people.

Lyotard’s rejection of traditional unities leads a contemporary postmodernist like Jean-Luc Nancy (1940-) to refocus history on smaller-scale and self-enclosed ‘immanent’ communities like brotherhoods or families rather than on society writ-large. Required for that is a new way of writing history that embraces a multiplicity of perspectives and standards of judgment, and, by extension, a willingness to embrace the plurality of moral and political lessons that can be drawn absent conviction in a single correct narrative. Postmodern theory was influential, for but one example, in the post-colonialism of Edward Said’s (1935-2003) Orientalism (1978), which became prominent for its attempt to open a discursive space for competing non-dominant narratives by the so-called ‘sub-altern’ other. Standpoint narratives, exercises in ‘cultural memory’, and oral history have lately won increasing popularity.

8. 20th Century Anglophone

Like analytic philosophy generally, analytic philosophy of history is partly characterized by its Anglophone heritage and partly by a propensity to treat individual problems rather than offering comprehensive interpretations of reality. The major difference between analytic and continental philosophy of history concerns the former’s almost exclusive focus on epistemological issues of historiography and a general indifference toward questions of historicity.

Anglophone philosophy of history is also marked by its conscious self-distancing from the teleological systems of the Hegelians. There were essentially two reasons for this, one political and one epistemological, brought to eloquent expression in Karl Popper’s (1902-1994) The Open Society and Its Enemies (1945) and The Poverty of Historicism (1957). Concerning the former, Popper charged that the ideological impetus for the totalitarian regimes of the previous hundred years was their shared belief in a national or religious destiny that was both guaranteed and justified by a grand historical process. Whether Bismarck, Communism, Fascism, or Nazism, all were confident that history was inexorably marching toward a global regime that would guarantee their way of life and justify the actions taken in their name. The Anglophone tradition was inspired to deny the grand teleological narrative partly as a political aversion to this way of thinking. Epistemologically, Popper’s ‘falsifiability’ criterion of positive knowledge also targeted the teleological systems of the 19th century. Largely accepting Bertrand Russell’s (1872-1970) natural ontology, he argued that the teleologists began from non-falsifiable assumptions about metaphysical processes, which ignored the empirical facts of the past for the sake of positing what they thought the past must have been. The focus of philosophy of history in the Anglophone world after Popper turned away from attempts to provide grand narratives in order to deal with specific meta-historical problems.

One problem, carried over from the 19th century scientific philosophers of history, was the logic of historical explanation. Similar to their positivist counterparts, the earlier analytics held explanations to be justified insofar as they were able to render historical events predictable by means of deducing their particulars under a general law. The most well-known expression comes from C.G. Hempel (1905-1997). “Historical explanation, too, aims at showing that the event in question was not a ‘matter of chance’, but was to be expected in view of certain antecedent or simultaneous conditions. The expectation referred to is not prophecy or divination, but rational scientific anticipation which rests on the assumption of general laws” (Hempel 1959, 348f). The logic itself is straightforward: “The explanation of the occurrence of an event of some specific kind E at a certain place and time consists, as it is usually expressed, in indicating the causes or determining factors of E” (Ibid, 345). In this respect, the logic of historical explanation is no different from the logic of scientific explanation. And while they may be more difficult to locate, once the laws of historical change have been discovered by psychology, anthropology, economics, or sociology, the predictive force of historiography should theoretically rival that of the natural sciences.

Hempel’s confidence came under attack from those like Popper who thought that history could not offer absolute regularities and maintained that predictions were never inviolable but at best probable ‘trends’. Attack also came from R.G. Collingwood, who denied the existence of covering laws in history and accordingly the applicability of scientific explanatory mechanisms. For him, as well as for Michael Oakeshott, history is a study of the uniqueness of the past and not its generalities, and always for the sake of understanding rather than proving or predicting. In agreement with Aristotle, Oakeshott believes, “the moment historical facts are regarded as instances of general laws, history is dismissed” (Oakeshott 1933, 154). It is the particular, especially the particular person, that history studies, and as such the attempt to predict their behavior nomothetically is not only impossible but misunderstands the very reason for historical inquiry in the first place.

Contrary to Aristotle, the unscientific character of history for Collingwood and Oakeshott renders it no less-worthy a course of study. Indeed, following the Post-Kantian 19th century philosophers of history and ultimately Vico, they thought the past proves itself more intelligible precisely because the objects under investigation can be understood from the ‘inside’ rather than explained from a standpoint outside the object. The proper task of history, Collingwood thought, was not to address mere general naturalistic events but the rationality of specific actions. A mass migration can be studied by the sociologist, the geographer, or the volcanologist from the ‘outside’ as a natural event. What marks the historian, by contrast, is her interest in the actions of the migrating individuals in terms of their intentions and decisions. While this may not be recorded in any palpable evidence, Collingwood was consistent with Herder in thinking that the historian must attempt to ‘get inside the head’ of the agents being investigated under the presumption that they typically make similarly reasonable choices as she would in the same situation. Collingwood’s advocation of a sort of empathic projection into the mind of past agents has been criticized as armchair psychologism. It would be difficult to deny, however, that many working historians adopt Collingwood’s intuitivism rather than the Hempelian nomothetic deduction.

In the latter half of the 20th century, a number of explanatory theories were proposed which walk a middle line between the nomothetic and idealist proposals. W.H. Walsh (1913-1986) returned to William Whewell’s (1794-1866) conception of ‘colligation’ type explanations as a way of making the past intelligible. Here the effort is neither to demonstrate nor to predict, but to bring together various relevant events around a central unifying concept in order to make clear their interconnections:

What we want from historians is […] an account which brings out their connections and bearing on one another. And when historians are in a position to give such an account it may be said that they have succeeded in ‘making sense of’ or ‘understanding’ their material. (Walsh 1957, 299)

In this way, Walsh’s meta-theory sides neither with the ‘scientific’ philosophers of history of either the Comteian or Hempelian variety nor with the British idealists, but maintains that the explanatory force of historiography rests in its narrativity. Just as the pedagogical value of a narrative is not reducible to what it can demonstrate, so the value of history rests in its ability to make sense of various features of the lives and times of others.

William Dray (1921-2009), too, argued that historical explanation does not require the sufficient conditions for why something happened, but only the necessary conditions for describing how what did happen could possibly have happened. For example, if an historian accounts for the assassination of a king in terms of his unpopular policies and dishonest court, then this explains ‘how’ his assassination could possibly have occurred without relying on a Hempelian deduction from some suppositional law that claims all kings with unpopular policies and dishonest courts will necessarily be assassinated.

A second problem addressed by 20th century Anglophone philosophers of history concerned the nature and possibility of objectivity. While all would agree with Ranke that historiography should endeavor to expunge overt biases and prejudices, the question remains to what extent this could or even should be done. Carl Becker (1873-1945) was perhaps the first Anglophone thinker to take up Croce’s claim that all history is ‘contemporary’ in the sense of being written necessarily from the perspective of present-day interests. Along these lines Charles Beard (1874-1948) had a series of arguments against the Rankean ideal of objectivity. Historiography cannot observe its subject matter since by definition what is in the past is no longer in the present; evidence is always fragmentary and never controllable the way a scientific experiment can control its variables; historians impose structures that the events themselves do not have; and their accounts are selective in ways that betray the historians’ own interests. Nevertheless, Beard would not come to endorse the sort of relativistic narrativism of his post-modern continental counterparts.

It certainly seems true to say that historians select – insofar as a map is itself not the road – and that their selection is a matter of what they personally esteem worth discussing, whether on the level of their general topic or in terms of which causes they consider relevant within an explanation. But selectivity of itself does not imply prejudice; and a careful reader is more often than not able to distinguish overtly prejudiced accounts from one whose selections are balanced and fair. Moreover, the fact that they are selective would not serve as a prima facie principle of discernment between historians and scientists, since the latter are every bit as selective in the topics under their purview. Even if science and historiography choose their inquiries as a matter of personal interest, both operate under norms to be impartial, to use only reputable evidence, and to present ‘the whole truth’, even should it call into question their hypotheses.

Isaiah Berlin (1909-1997) considered the problem of historiographical objectivity from the perspective of the objects written about rather than exclusively the writer. While the scientist has little emotional commitment to the chemicals or atoms under examination, historians often have strong feelings about the moral consequences of their subjects. The choice between historical designations like ‘terrorist’ and ‘freedom fighter’, ‘sedition’ and ‘revolution’, or ‘ruler’ and ‘tyrant’ are normatively connotative in a way that scientific descriptions can easily avoid. Yet to write about the holocaust or slavery in a purposefully detached way misses the intensely personal character of these events and thus fails to communicate their genuine meaning, even if doing so detracts from their status as objective records in a way scientific history would disallow. Historians justifiably maintain “that minimal degree of moral or psychological evaluation which is necessarily involved in viewing human beings as creatures with purposes and motives (and not merely as causal factors in the procession of events)” (Berlin 1954, 52f). What precisely that minimal degree is, however, and how a working historian can navigate moral gray areas without falling back into inherited biases, remains difficult to account for.

Beard’s contentions about the possibility of objectivity led some philosophers of history to wonder whether the past was something that existed only in the mind of the historian, if, in other words, the past was constructed rather than discovered. For a constructivist like Leon Goldstein (1927-2002), this does not imply an ontological anti-realism wherein none but perceptible objects are considered real. For Goldstein, it would be senseless for historians to doubt that the world they study ever existed; constructivists are equally constrained by evidence as their objectivist counterparts. And for both the evidence with which the historian works concerns a genuinely past state of affairs outside their own minds. The meaningfulness of that evidence –what the evidence is evidence ‘of’— is, for the constructivist, only imbued by the mind of the historian who considers it. A Roman coin is a piece of evidence dating from a certain era and can provide evidence ‘of’ that era’s monetary policy and trade. But that coin is also evidence ‘of’ the natural environment of every single moment it was buried in the ground thereafter, providing evidence, if one were so interested, in the corrosive effects of the acidity levels near the banks of the Tiber. What that evidence is evidence ‘of’ depends upon the mind of the historian who utilizes it to construct a meaningful account in accord with her interests. Were the viewer of the coin wholly oblivious to either Rome or the natural environment, the coin would not cease to exist, of course; but it would cease to evidence either of these topics. In that sense at least, even non-postmodern Anglophone philosophers of history admit the necessarily interpretive and constructive aspects of historiography. Peter Novick (1934-) and Richard Evans (1947-) have recently taken up the limits of constructivism on behalf of professional historians.

How causes function within historical accounts was the third major question for 20th century Anglophone philosophers of history. Historians, like most people, tend to treat causal terms like ‘influenced’, ‘generated’, ‘brought about’, ‘led to’, ‘resulted in’, among others, as unproblematic diagnostics to explain how events come about. For philosophers generally and for philosophers of history specifically, causation presents a multifaceted set of problems. According to the positivist theory of explanation, an adequate causal account explicates the sum total of necessary and sufficient conditions for an event to take place. This ideal bar is acknowledged as having been set too high for practicing historians, since there is perhaps a near infinity of necessary causes for any historical event. That the assassination of Archduke Ferdinand was a cause of the First World War is clear; but necessary, too, was an indescribably myriad set of other economic, social, political, geographical, and even personal factors that led to such a wide-reaching and complex phenomenon to take place precisely as it did: had Gavrilo Princip not associated with the Young Bosnian movement, had gravity failed that day causing bullets to float harmlessly upward, had the Austro-Hungarian alliance not held the southern Slavic provinces, had Franz Ferdinand decided to stay at home on June 28th, 1914 – were any of these conditions actual, the course of history would have been altered. Thus, their contraries were necessary for having produced the exact outcome that obtained. Because it would be quite impossible, if not ridiculous, for an historian to attempt to record all of these, he must admit that his explanation fails to satisfy the positivist criterion and therefore remains only a partial one –an ‘explanation sketch’ in Hempel’s phrasing.

R.G. Collingwood was again influential in overturning the positivist view by distinguishing causes and motives. Physical causes such as properly working guns or the presence of gravity are necessary for assassination in a strictly physical sense. But no historian would bother mentioning them. Only motives, the reasons agents have for conducting their actions, are typically referenced: what motives Princip had for firing and what motives the leaders of Germany, France, and Russia had to mobilize their armies. A proper explanation, for Collingwood, involves making clear the reasons why the key actors participated in an event as they did.

While Collingwood’s theory is intuitively suggestive and matches rather well the character of most historical accounts, some philosophers have noted shortcomings. One is that Collingwood presumes a freedom of choice that relies upon an outmoded notion of cognitive agency. The same reasons that are purported to have been causally efficacious are often enough retrospective justifications supplied by agents who in reality acted without conscious deliberation. Second, even if freedom of choice is presumed, transparency about an agent’s motives cannot be. Collingwood often appeals to a particular motive as what a reasonable being would elect to do in a certain situation. Yet those standards of reasonability more often betray the historian’s own projection than anything psychologically demonstrable. The third is that, as historians themselves often note, many actions do not result from the motives of their agents but from the confluence of several motives whose outcome is unpredictable. The motive for Princip’s assassination was not to start a world-wide conflict anymore than Robert E. Lee’s capture of John Brown at Harper’s Ferry was intended to begin the American Civil War. Both actions were nevertheless crucial causes of consequences whose main actors could not have foreseen them, much less have willed.

Following the conception of causation in legal theory promulgated by H.L.A. Hart (1907-1992) and Tony Honoré (1921-), some philosophers consider a proper causal ascription in history to amount to a description of both intention and abnormality. Just as in legal cases, where conditions in history are normalized the abnormal or untypical decision or event is assigned responsibility for what results. In our example of the causes of WWI, the long history of constant political bickering between the great powers was of course part of the story, but the assassination of the Archduke is assigned responsibility since it stands so untypically out of its context.

The shift in thinking about historical causes as metaphysical entities which bring about change themselves to a set of epistemological grounds that explain why change occurred has led some recent philosophers to adopt David Lewis’s (1941-2001) notion of counterfactuals. “We think of a cause as something that makes a difference, and the difference it makes must be a difference from what would have happened without it. Had it been absent, its effects ─ some of them, at least, and usually all ─ would have been absent as well” (Lewis 1986, 161). Counterfactuals had long been employed by historians in the commonsense way that ascribes sufficient cause to that object or event whose consequence could not have happened without it, in the form ‘were it not for A, B never would have occurred’ or ‘No B without A’. To adapt our previous example, one might justifiably think the assassination of Archduke Ferdinand was the sufficient cause of WWI if and only if one thinks WWI would not have happened in its absence. Yet whereas counterfactuals are easily enough tested in science by running multiple experiments that control for the variable in question, the unrepeatability of historical events renders traditional counterfactual statements little more than interesting speculations. To ask how Rome would have developed had Caesar never crossed the Rubicon may be a fascinating thought experiment, but nothing remotely verifiable since a contrary-to-fact conditional is by definition unable to be tested given only one course of facts. Lewis would revise this traditional notion of counterfactuals to include the semantics of maximally similar possible worlds, wherein two worlds are supposed entirely identical save for one alteration which brings about the event in question. Under the previous description of the necessary conditions for WWI, Franz Ferdinand’s assassination was considered a necessary condition. Lewis’s revised version instead presents two maximally similar worlds, world ‘A’ where the assassination takes place and world ‘B’ which is identical in all respects except that the assassination does not take place. Under this model, it is at best debatable whether war would not have broken out anyway in world ‘B’ given the highly charged political atmosphere in Europe at that time. And as such we are invited to question whether assigning the assassination a causal role is justified.

9. Contemporary

Characterized by its criticism of the 20th century Anglophone attempts to epistemologically ground historical explanation, objectivity, and causation as universal functions of logic, the Postmodern legacy in philosophy of history has been taken up by three contemporary theorists in particular: Hayden White (1928-), Frank Ankersmit (1945-), and Keith Jenkins (1943-). Each maintains that the analysis of these epistemological issues wrongly circumvents questions about interpretation and meaning, and each considers the search for once-and-for-all demonstrations an attempt to avoid the relativistic character of historical truth. Hayden White inaugurated this ‘linguistic turn’ in historiography with his Meta-History: The Historical Imagination in Nineteenth-Century Europe (1979). By focusing on the structures and strategies of historical accounts, White came to see historiography and literature as fundamentally the same endeavor. Historians, like fiction writers, wrote according to a four-fold logic of emplotment, according to whether they saw their subject matter as a romance, tragedy comedy, or satire. This aim stems from their political ideology – anarchist, radical, conservative, or liberal respectively – and is worked out by means of a dominant rhetorical trope – metaphor, metonymy, synecdoche, or irony respectively. Representative philosophers – Nietzsche, Marx, Hegel, and Croce – and representative historians – Michelet, Tocqueville, Ranke, and Burckhardt – are themselves tied to these modes of emplotment. While White’s architectonic has come under criticism as being both overly reductive in its structure and a warrant for relativism, other theorists have taken up his banner.

Among these, Frank Ankersmit endorses the general outline of White’s narrativism, while stressing the constructivist aspect of our experience of the past. There is no ‘ideal narratio’ for Ankersmit, because ultimately there is no ontological structure onto which the single ‘correct’ narration can be correspondentially grafted. Alongside Gianni Vattimo (1936-), Sande Cohen (1946-), and Alan Munslow (1947-), Keith Jenkins takes White’s anti-realism in a decidedly deconstructionist fashion. Jenkins exhorts an end to historiography as customarily practiced. Since historians can never be wholly objective, and since historical judgment cannot pretend to a correspondential standard of truth, all that remains of history are the congealed power structures of a privileged class. In a statement that summarizes much of contemporary historical theory, Jenkins concludes the following:

[Historiography] now appears as a self-referential, problematic expression of ‘interests’, an ideologically-interpretive discourse without any ‘real’ access to the past as such; unable to engage in any dialogue with ‘reality’. In fact, ‘history’ now appears to be just one more ‘expression’ in a world of postmodern expressions: which of course is what it is. (Jenkins 1995, 9)

Although 21st century philosophy of history has widened the gap between practicing historians and theorists of history, and although it has lost some of the popularity it enjoyed from the early-19th to mid-20th century, it will remain a vigorous field of inquiry so long as the past itself continues to serve as a source of philosophical curiosity.

10. References and Further Reading

a. Classical Works in English Translation

  • Herodotus, Histories (c.450BCE-c.420BCE), translated by J. Marincola (London, 1996).
  • Thucydides, History of the Peloponnesian War (431BCE), translated by R. Warner (London, 1972).
  • Augustine of Hippo, The City of God (c. 422), translated by R.W. Dyson (Cambridge, 1998).
  • J. B. Bossuet, A Universal History (1681) (London, 1778).
  • G. Vico, The New Science (1725), translated by Bergin & Fisch (Ithaca, NY, 1948).
  • C. Montesquieu, The Spirit of the Laws (1748), translated by T. Nugent (London, 1902).
  • F.M.A. Voltaire, “Historiography” and “History” in his Philosophical Dictionary (1764), volume IV, translated by J. Morley (London, 1824).
  • J.G. Herder, Outlines of a Philosophy of the History of Man (1781), translated by T. Churchill (London, 1803).
  • I. Kant, “The Idea of a Universal Cosmo-Political History” (1784), translated by W. Hastie, in Eternal Peace and Other International Essays (Boston, 1914).
  • E. Burke, Reflections on the Revolution in France (1790) (London: 1940).
  • A.N. Condorcet, Sketch for a Historical Picture of the Progress of the Human Mind (1795), translated by J. Barraclough (London, 1955).
  • G.W.F. Hegel, Introduction to the Philosophy of History (1837), translated by L. Rauch (Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing, 1988).
  • T. Carlyle, On Heroes, Hero-Worship, and the Heroic in History (1841), in The Works of Thomas Carlyle, edited by H. Traill (New York, 1896-1901).
  • J.S. Mill, A System of Logic (1843), in Collected Works, edited by J. Robson (Toronto, 1963-91).
  • A. Comte, The Positive Philosophy of Auguste Comte (1853), 2 vols., translated by H. Martineau (London, 1893).
  • H.T. Buckle, History of Civilization in England (1864), 3 vols. (London, 1899).
  • J. Burckhardt, Judgments on History and Historians (compiled from 1860’s-1880’s), translated by H. Zohn (Boston, 1958).
  • F. Nietzsche, On the Uses and Disadvantages of History for Life (1874), translated by P. Preuss (Indianapolis, 1980).
  • W. Dilthey, Introduction to the Human Sciences (1883), translated by Makkreel & Rodi (Princeton, 1991).
  • F. Nietzsche,  On the Genealogy of Morals (1887), translated by Clark & Swensen (Indianapolis, 1998).
  • W. Windelband, An Introduction to Philosophy (1895), translated by J. McCabe (London, 1921).
  • H. Rickert, Science and History: A Critique of Positivist Epistemology (1899), translated by G. Reisman (New York, 1962).
  • B. Croce, Theory and History of Historiography (1916), translated by D. Ainslie (London, 1921).
  • O. Spengler, The Decline of the West (1923), 2 vols., translated by C.F. Atkinson (New York, 1947).
  • M. Oakeshott, Experience and Its Modes (Cambridge, 1933).
  • A. Toynbee, A Study of History, 10 vols. (Oxford, 1934-54).
  • B. Croce, History as the Story of Liberty (1938), translated by S. Sprigge (London, 1941).
  • M. Mandelbaum, The Problem of Historical Knowledge (New York, 1938).
  • C. Hempel, “The Function of General Laws in History (1942),” in Theories of History, edited by P. Gardiner (New York/London, 1959), 344-356.
  • K. Popper, The Open Society and Its Enemies, 2 vols. (1945).
  • R. Collingwood, The Idea of History (Oxford, 1946).
  • K. Popper, The Poverty of Historicism (London, 1957).
  • B. Russell, Understanding History (New York, 1957).
  • K. Popper, The Logic of Scientific Discovery (New York, 1959).
  • H.G. Gadamer, Truth and Method (1960), translated by Weinsheimer & Marshall (New York, 1989).
  • E.H. Carr, What is History? (New York, 1961).
  • A. Danto, Analytical Philosophy of History (Cambridge, 1965).
  • C. Hempel, Aspects of Scientific Explanation (New York, 1965).
  • W. Dray, Philosophical Analysis and History (New York, 1966).
  • G. Elton, The Practice of History (London, 1969).
  • M. Foucault, The Archeology of Knowledge (New York, 1972).
  • H. White, Meta-history: The Historical Imagination in Nineteenth-century Europe (Baltimore, 1973).
  • E. Said, Orientalism (New York, 1978).
  • J.F. Lyotard, The Postmodern Condition: A Report on Knowledge (1979), translated by Bennington & Massumi (Minneapolis, 1984).
  • P. Ricoeur, Time and Narrative (1983-5), 3 vols., translated by McLaughlin & Pellauer (Chicago, 1984-8)
  • P. Novick, That Noble Dream: The ‘Objectivity Question’ and the American Historical Profession (Cambridge, 1988).
  • K. Jenkins, Re-Thinking History (London, 1991).
  • R. Evans, In Defense of History (London, 1999).
  • F. Ankersmit, Historiographical Representation (Stanford, 2001).

b. Prominent Scholarship and Collections

  • R. Aron, Introduction to the Philosophy of History, translated by G. Irwin (Westport, CT, 1976).
  • C. Bambach, Heidegger, Dilthey, and the Crisis of Historicism (Ithaca, NY, 1995).
  • C. Becker, Everyman his own Historian (New York, 1935).
  • I. Berlin, Historical Inevitability (New York, 1954).
  • I. Berlin, Vico and Herder: Two Studies in the History of Ideas (New York, 1976).
  • M. Bloch, The Historian’s Craft, translated by P. Putnam (New York, 1953).
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Author Information

Anthony K. Jensen
City University of New York / Lehman College
U. S. A.

Lucian Blaga (1895-1961)

Lucian BlagaLucian Blaga was a prominent philosopher in Eastern Europe during the period between the two world wars. Trained in both Eastern Orthodox theology and classical philosophy, he developed a “speculative” philosophy that includes books on epistemology, metaphysics, aesthetics, philosophy of culture, philosophical anthropology, philosophy of history, philosophy of science, and philosophy of religion. A chair in philosophy of culture was created for him at the University of Cluj, a leading Romanian university of the period, now Babes-Bolyai University.

Unfortunately, the height of Blaga’s career coincided with WWII, after which Romania was occupied by Soviet troops that installed a socialist government. The new government removed Blaga and many other professors from their university posts. Although Blaga was forbidden to teach and publish, he continued to study and write. Eventually thirty-four of his books of philosophy were published. At the heart of his philosophical publications are four trilogies that constitute a systematic philosophy, a feat that has rarely been attempted since Hegel. He also published books of poetry and theater, plus one novel.

Today Blaga is a national figure in Romania, but because of the unfortunate circumstances surrounding his career, he is barely known to the outside world. However, because of his creativity and systematic vision, his work is being actively studied in Europe in the 21st century. There are those who argue that this mid-20th century philosopher can make valuable contributions to issues that philosophers are still struggling with today.

This article begins by explaining Blaga’s intellectual formation, which provides a context for understanding his philosophy. It then introduces the main features of his philosophical system and provides a bibliography of primary and secondary sources for further study.

Table of Contents

  1. Biographical Sketch
  2. Philosophy of Philosophy
  3. Epistemology
  4. Metaphysics
  5. Other Philosophical Issues
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
      1. English
      2. Romanian
      3. Other Languages
    2. Secondary Sources in English

1. Biographical Sketch

Lucian Blaga (1895-1961) was the son of a village priest. The village was Lancram, an ethnically Romanian village on the eastern edge of the Austro-Hungarian Empire. The priest was Isidor Blaga, an avid reader who seems to have enjoyed studying German philosophy as much as Orthodox theology. Isidor only reluctantly accepted the priestly vacancy in Lancram that was created by the premature death of his own father. A lack of finances to continue his education made this choice a necessity, but the priestly vocation was not Isidor’s original goal: he seems to have harbored more academic aspirations. His interest in higher learning, his interest in philosophy and his personal library would leave a profound imprint on his youngest son.

Life in the Romanian village too left a profound imprint on Blaga. A Romanian village of the late nineteenth and early twentieth century was essentially unaltered from medieval times. There was no industry and little mechanization to speak of. The economy was agricultural. The only schooling was a one-room primary school. Yet, a wealth of traditional wisdom preserved in legends, ballads, poems, and perhaps especially the multitude of proverbs and aphorisms that Lucian Blaga later collected and published in several volumes, provided its own kind of philosophical insight. The culture of the Romanian village would be the subject of Blaga’s acceptance speech given at his induction into the Romanian Academy in 1936.

Because of the dismal academics of the village elementary school and the complete lack of a high school, Isidor and his wife, Ana, sacrificed to send Lucian to private boarding schools. The urban centers in Transylvania were either Hungarian or German, and as a result the best educational opportunities were in Hungarian or German schools. The first school that Blaga attended was a German boarding school in the nearby town of Sebes. Here he studied in German and read important German thinkers. Blaga next enrolled in the prestigious Andrei Saguna High School in the city of Brasov where he studied German, Hungarian, Latin, and Greek. He was particularly interested in the natural sciences, the philosophy of science, and also world religions. A senior thesis was required for graduation from Andrei Saguna: Blaga’s was on Einstein’s relativity and Poincare’s non-Euclidean geometry.

Blaga intended to enroll in a German university upon graduation, but the onset of WWI prevented this. He took the only option open to him besides military service: he enrolled in the Romanian Orthodox seminary in Sibiu, another Transylvanian city. Although he neither enjoyed nor excelled at the more pastoral aspects of the seminary curriculum, he surpassed his classmates in the theoretical areas of study. During this period he especially increased his understanding of philosophy of religion and the history of art.

Blaga completed his undergraduate degree in 1917 and enrolled in the PhD program in philosophy at the University of Vienna. During this time he published his first two books, a book of poetry and a book of aphorisms, which sold well in Romania and helped him finance his studies. He successfully defended his dissertation in November of 1920. It was titled Kultur und Erkenntnis (Culture and Knowledge).

Blaga’s life experiences growing up in a multicultural region (Transylvania was populated by Romanians, Hungarians, Germans, Gypsies, and several smaller minority groups); experiencing the contrast between the peasant village and the modern city; and studying Eastern Orthodox theology and liturgy side by side with European philosophy, history, and science spawned in him a philosophical outlook that gives prominent place to philosophy of culture. Within the broad framework of culture Blaga finds places for science, art, history, and religion.

Blaga’s philosophical system interacts with the theories of classical and contemporary philosophers and intellectuals. These range from the pre-Socratics through early twentieth century philosophers like William James, Edmund Husserl, and Henri Bergson, and also intellectuals such as Albert Einstein, Sigmund Freud, and Paul Tillich. The influence of Plotinus, Kant, and the German Romantics is clearly evident. But Blaga’s philosophy is not merely an attempt to synthesize the insights of other thinkers. It is a systematic and integrated attempt to address the issues that occupied the leading minds of his day.

Blaga’s early philosophical career involved research and publication rather than teaching. He published many articles and a number of books, and served as an editor for several literary magazines. His publications range from fiction to philosophy. His first book of philosophy, Filosofia stilului (The Philosophy of Style), was published in 1924. He also served his country as a statesman. In 1936 he was inducted into the Romanian Academy (a prestigious research institution). Finally in 1938 a special chair of philosophy of culture was created in his honor at the University of Cluj, a leading Romanian university in Transylvania. His inaugural essay was titled Despre plenitudinea istorica (Concerning Historical Fullness). He taught at the University of Cluj until 1949, when he was removed from his post by the newly installed Socialist government of Romania. After this he was not permitted to teach and was only permitted to publish under strict supervision. After his death in 1961 a number of his works were permitted to be posthumously published, and since the fall of Romanian communism Blaga’s entire oeuvre has been republished.

2. Philosophy of Philosophy

Some philosophers philosophize about a range of topics without ever turning their analytic skills to an analysis of philosophy itself. In contrast to this, Blaga begins his systematic philosophy with an entire book dedicated to a critical discussion of philosophy. The title of this book is Despre constiinta filosofica (Concerning Philosophical Consciousness). It describes philosophy as a creative and constructive attempt to understand reality. Therefore Blaga views the construction of a systematic metaphysics as the pinnacle of the philosophical enterprise.

At the same time, Blaga rejects the notion that a philosophical system can ever provide an ultimate analysis of reality. All philosophical systems are creative interpretations that attempt to express reality symbolically through human language. But despite this apparent futility inherent in the philosophical task, Blaga views the attempt to “reveal” ultimate reality as the activity that brings humans closest to fulfillment.

The philosophical method is characterized by the utilization of logic and the attempt at objectivity, but subjectivity and style also have their place. Blaga elucidates the proper function of each. He argues that every philosophical system has a central thesis that orients the system. He names the orientation that this point provides the “transcendental accent.” This accent is an expression of the style of the philosopher who created it. For example, the knowledge of the Ideals, which serves as the transcendental accent in Plato’s philosophy, seems to reflect Plato’s own expansive personality and his drive to understand the many disparate aspects of his world.

It is not only the individual who is affected by controlling themes: such beliefs affect entire cultures. Sometimes these themes enter the public subconscious and are called “common sense.” Blaga recognizes that common sense beliefs often preserve wisdom based upon a wealth of experiences, but also warns that they sometimes preserve the prejudices and mistakes of previous generations. He then makes an important and controversial observation about the relationship of philosophy to common sense: whereas many Anglo-American philosophers have taken it upon themselves to defend common sense, Blaga argues that a philosopher must shun the conformist impulse underlying belief in common sense. A philosopher sometimes needs to attack common sense beliefs in order to open up a space for greater understanding.

This position vis-à-vis common sense could be taken as an indication that Blaga views philosophy as a realist rather than a constructivist attempt to understand reality. This would be at least partially mistaken, however. Blaga views philosophy as a creative activity that is justified even when its results are mistaken, since it deepens and enriches the understanding of the problematic of the human spirit. Thus philosophical speculation is justified quite apart from the truthfulness of its theories. Philosophy is justified by its fruitfulness, vision, suggestiveness, foresight, and how it stirs the soul, even if its theories never attain complete perfection.

This seems to suggest that philosophy is closer to art than to science, a view that would displease many analytic philosophers. Blaga finds both differences and similarities between philosophy and science. The primary difference between philosophy and science is methodological. Both begin with a set of objective data (the aria) and with certain presuppositions about how the data will be handled (the interior horizon of the problem). But while the data of science is very specific and the presuppositions are detailed and complex, the data of philosophy includes all of human experience and the presuppositions are very general. Because of this, a scientific investigation is very closely controlled by its initial data and its presuppositions; while philosophical investigation is open to many creative solutions that the scientist would not consider. Initially this might seem like a disadvantage, since it seems like an admission of the undisciplined nature of philosophical investigation in comparison to the fairly rigid discipline of the natural sciences. However, it also has a significant strength: Blaga points out that because of the very specific aria and interior horizon of a scientific investigation, science methodologically anticipates its solutions much more than philosophy does. Hence philosophy is more open to discovering the unexpected.

3. Epistemology

This discussion of the difference between philosophy and science draws on several ideas that Blaga elaborates in his epistemology. His primary works on this subject are the three books that comprise his “Trilogy of Knowledge”: Eonul dogmatic (The Dogmatic Age), Cunoasterea luciferica (Luciferic Cognition), and Cenzura transcendenta (Transcendent Censorship). These books analyze, with surprising lucidity, the entire range of modes of human cognition.

Blaga analyzes cognition into seven possible modes:

  1. Positive-adequate cognition
  2. Quasi-cognition
  3. Negative cognition
  4. Cognition that is part positive-adequate and part quasi-cognition
  5. Cognition that is part positive-adequate and part negative cognition
  6. Cognition that is part positive-adequate and part quasi-cognition and part negative cognition
  7. Cognition that is part quasi-cognition and part negative cognition

He discusses each of these modes of cognition, but only the second and the seventh are actually realized by humans. The second, quasi-cognition, can be further analyzed into concrete cognition, paradisaic cognition, mythic cognition, and occult cognition. The seventh, which Blaga names “luciferic cognition,” can be analyzed into three subdivisions: plus-cognition, zero-cognition, and minus-cognition. His discussion of the subdivisions of luciferic cognition, which is the subject of his book by that name, is perhaps the most original and most interesting part of his epistemology.

Blaga remarks that the possible forms of cognition can be analyzed into three types: (1) cognition that is positive-adequate and unlimited, (2) cognition that is censured but in principle unlimited, and (3) cognition that is positive-adequate but strictly limited. The first type would pertain only to a deity. The third type pertains to simple organisms and enables them to perform functions such as the replication of lost appendages. Human cognition falls within the second type, since human cognition is potentially unlimited in extent but strictly limited qualitatively, because it never completely captures its object and never perfectly corresponds to reality.

Mystery, and the cognitive limits that produce mystery, are central to Blaga’s epistemology (and perhaps to his whole philosophy). The reason for these limits is explained in his metaphysics, and the means are explained in his philosophy of culture.

There are at least five important features of Blaga’s epistemology that are innovative, to a greater or lesser degree, and that are significant epistemological contributions. The first of these is the placing of his epistemology within a complementary and explicatory metaphysical system, which will be discussed presently. This metaphysical speculation provides answers to such epistemologically relevant questions as: what are the material, efficient, and final causes of the human epistemological situation; why this situation pertains; how it was implemented; and how it is preserved. A second important feature is Blaga’s emphasis on the important role played in human cognition by culture. According to Blaga, even categories of understanding are culturally affected. He argues that there are both subjective and beautifully creative aspects of human cognition, and also that human cognition is not thwarted by its historicity but is rather empowered by it.

The third and fourth important contributions of Blaga’s epistemology are his analysis of the two types of cognition that he calls “luciferic cognition” and “minus-cognition.” Minus-cognition is a subset of luciferic cognition. Blaga devoted an entire book of his epistemological trilogy to minus-cognition, and another is largely devoted to luciferic cognition. In his elucidation of these two types of cognition, Blaga uncovers methods of problem solving that have heretofore been largely overlooked in Western epistemology.

A fifth important aspect of Blaga’s epistemology is its constructivism. Constructivism, the view that knowledge is a human construct, is a ubiquitous element of Blaga’s philosophy. It was seen in the previous elaboration of Blaga’s philosophy of philosophy, it is reflected in his epistemology, it will be seen in his freely creative metaphysics, and it can also be seen in his philosophy of culture and philosophy of religion.

There have been numerous other constructivist philosophers, ranging from Kant through Nietzsche to 20th century figures such as Jean Piaget and Ernst van Glasersfeld. Nonetheless, there are several important things about Blaga’s constructivism that make it particularly noteworthy. The first of these is how neatly and consistently constructivism fits within the larger philosophical picture that Blaga paints. His philosophical system gives constructivism a context, an explanation and a purpose that are sometimes lacking in other constructivist philosophies. A second noteworthy aspect of his constructivism is that it is argued for in a wide variety of cognitive contexts: Blaga shows that human thought is constructivist whether it occurs in math, the natural sciences, philosophy, theology, the arts, or in any other cognitive context. A third important aspect is how his constructivism is argued: he does not cease being a constructivist when he argues for his own philosophical system. He views his own system as merely a possible thesis supported (but not proved) by evidence and pragmatic utility.

More should be said about luciferic cognition, since this is one of the key insights of Blaga’s epistemology. Paradisaic cognition (what could be considered “ordinary cognition”) attempts to quantitatively reduce the mysteries of existence. Its progress is linear, adding new facts to the existent body of knowledge. Luciferic cognition, on the other hand, seeks to qualitatively reduce mystery through attenuation or, if that is not possible, through permanentization or intensification of the mysterious. Its progress is inward, deepening and intensifying knowledge of the hidden essence of the cognitive object. Every step of progress leads to another step, ad infinitum, and thus luciferic cognition is never totally successful in grasping its object, but it is successful in providing new understanding of the layers and aspects of the mystery of its being. Luciferic cognition does not exceed the inherent limits of human cognition, but it does explore those limits and press cognition to its fullest extent.

Luciferic cognition is dependent on paradisaic cognition for its starting point, the empirical, conceptual, or imaginary data that Blaga calls “phanic material.” It then “provokes a crisis” in the phanic material through bringing out the mysteries inherent in the object. Whereas paradisaic cognition views objects of cognition as “given,” luciferic cognition views them as partly given, but also partly hidden. Whereas paradisaic cognition is subject to the “illusion of adequacy”—the mistaken belief that the object is as it is perceived to be or, more precisely, the mistaken belief that paradisaic cognition is able to grasp the object as it really is—luciferic cognition begins with the removal of this illusion. An investigation that stops at the mere defining of an object as it is “given” overlooks potentially multitudinous other facets of knowledge about the object.

The distinction between the object of paradisaic cognition and the object of luciferic cognition bears a resemblance to Kant’s phenomena-noumena distinction, but has several important differences. One significant difference is that the Kantian noumenon is an object that is one single mystery; the luciferic object is a long series of latent mysteries. An even more important difference is that whereas the Kantian noumenon is not available to human cognition, Blaga’s luciferic objects are available to luciferic cognition (but are not cognized in the same way as objects are cognized in paradisaic cognition).

Blaga’s analysis of the process of luciferic cognition is fairly detailed and very interesting. It includes ideas that mirror more recent developments in the philosophy of science, such as his concepts of “theory idea,” “directed observation,” “categorical dislocation,” and “Copernican inversion of the object.” His concept of “theory capacity” resembles ideas suggested by American Pragmatists.

Blaga weighs in on the issues of truth and verification, which have largely dominated discussions in recent analytic epistemology. He accepts coherence as a necessary but not sufficient condition of truthfulness, and demonstration of correspondence as a sufficient but not necessary condition. He suggests that the best way to verify the truthfulness of a theory is pragmatic: put it into practice. His own philosophy is consistent with these views: it is a cohesive system, but he does not appeal to this cohesiveness as the grounds for believing it true. Rather he appeals to its ability to facilitate the resolution of philosophical problems.

4. Metaphysics

Blaga’s metaphysic is contained in the three books that form his “Cosmological Trilogy”: Diferentialele divine, (Divine Differentials), Aspecte anthropologice (Anthropological Aspects), and Fiinta istorica (The Historical Being). It is centered on a cosmology that is specifically intended to complement his epistemology. It is sometimes characterized as a “speculative” metaphysic rather than an empirical one. Blaga is firmly persuaded that metaphysical theories are not (and cannot be) proven empirically, although he accords a significant role to experience in the testing of such theories. His method resembles the hypothetico-deductive method wherein a theoretically possible solution to a problem is granted as a working hypothesis, and then the consequences of this hypothesis are deduced in order to determine if they are compatible with generally accepted theory. If they are, then the hypothesis stands as provisionally vindicated, despite the fact that the hypothesis itself has not been directly verified empirically.

Blaga states that metaphysical starting points are presupposed at the outset of the metaphysical investigation and are only subsequently justified by their ability to organize data and to “construct a world.” In elucidating his metaphysical vision, Blaga proposes a cluster of premises that are essential to the system he intends to promulgate. He then elaborates how these form the basis of a system that provides, or enables, the resolution of certain important problems heretofore not satisfactorily resolved by other metaphysical systems.

It is widely acknowledged that Blaga accepts and works within a sort of neo-Kantian Idealism, wherein the actual existence of an external world is accepted as a necessary metaphysical corollary even though an external world is not directly knowable epistemologically. If doing metaphysics would be defined along realist lines, as an accurate description of “noumenal” reality, then Blaga would not be able to do metaphysics, since according to his epistemology humanity cannot have perfect knowledge of objects of cognition. However, because Blaga views metaphysics as a creative and pragmatically justified endeavor that attempts to reach beyond the empirical and provide a theoretical explanation for all of existence, metaphysics is possible.

One of the first issues addressed in Blaga's metaphysical writings is the question of the origin of the cosmos. It is conceivable that the cosmos has no origin, and that it has always existed. Alternatively, it is possible that the cosmos has a specific origin. Blaga opts for the latter view because it “enormously facilitates approaching cosmological problems” and is therefore to be preferred. Based on this pragmatic justification, he proceeds to construct his metaphysics around a postulated beginning and source of the world.

That both the origin and the source of the cosmos are unknown is admitted by Blaga. Therefore one of the ways that he refers to the source is “The Anonymous Fund.” Theoretically, the cosmos could be a result of one or more creative acts of this Fund acting upon external preexistent sources; it could be an emanation from the Fund; or it could even be a reproduction of the Fund. Blaga rejects the possibility of creation using sources outside of the Fund, presumably because this would entail the existence of a cosmos that precedes the creation of the present cosmos, introducing a regress that thwarts the solving of the problems that Blaga is addressing. He also rejects the possibility of creation ex nihilo. Blaga opts for a theory of emanation similar to that proposed by Plotinus, an emanation wherein the Fund reproduces itself endlessly without diminishing itself in any way.

Blaga proposes that the Fund be viewed as possessing, due to its own “fullness,” the capacity of infinite self-replication. It controls its reproduction so that it will not destabilize existence. (Blaga grants that this sort of talk is necessarily metaphorical.) But it is the nature of the Fund to create/reproduce (this is inherent in the meaning of “fund”); therefore it allows itself to reproduce, but only in a specific mode that assures the longevity and greatest success of its reproductive acts. This controlled reproduction is the best compromise between the Fund's capacity for replication and the necessity of safeguarding the centrality of existence. Had such precautions not been taken, the result of the Fund's creative capacity would be a series of competing funds rather than the present world. What is remarkable, according to Blaga, is not so much that the present world exists, but that a series of competing funds does not exist. The present world is a result of the Fund’s own self-limitation, of the partial thwarting of the Fund’s natural creativity.

The form that the controlled reproduction of the Anonymous Fund takes is that of creation through “differentials”. Differentials are minute particles emanated from the Fund that exactly replicate minute aspects of the Fund and are emanated in endless numbers. The differentials have a natural propensity to combine with each other, forming new subcreations. The most central differentials are withheld from emanation in order to prevent the recombination of differentials into a copy of the Anonymous Fund. The recombination of emitted differentials has created the present world in its ever-changing forms.

This schema depicts the origin of the world as taking place in three phases: (1) the operation of limiting the generative possibilities of the Anonymous Fund, (2) the emission of differentials, and (3) the combination of differentials, creating more complex beings through integration. The schema also depicts the creation of the world as being based upon two fundamental factors, the Anonymous Fund's reproductive potential and its success in directing this potential into creating in a manner that preserves its own hegemony as metaphysical center of the universe.

Integration of the differentials is a natural result of the fact that the differentials are, in their structure, particles of one integrated whole. But integration does not occur on the basis of a perfect match between differentials. If it did, there would only be one line of integration that would result in only one type of created being. Integration takes place on the basis of a merely sufficient match between differentials. This allows for a vast number of different integrations, which explains such empirical phenomena as the existence of sometimes similar, sometimes identical or parallel features in entities that belong to different kingdoms, classes, phyla, and species.

Blaga offers the following empirical analysis in support of his theory that the world is composed of differentials. Upon close inspection, it can be observed that all empirical existents display at least three types of discontinuity: (1) Structural discontinuity: some existents are very simple structurally, others are very complex. (2) Intrinsic discontinuity: existents are at the same time independent and interdependent. (3) Discontinuity of repetition: groups of existents of the same type are composed of individuals. These phenomena are explained by the existence of discontinuity in the very heart of the empirical world. This fundamental discontinuity is a result of the empirical world being composed of a multitude of diverse differentials, variously integrated and organized. Furthermore, Blaga argues that two lines of empirical proof show that creation takes place through something akin to differentials: (1) The widespread consistency of certain structures and the equally widespread variability of others indicates that at the base of existence there is a discontinuity of elements that are capable of a variety of different combinations. (2) The presence of similar or identical features in entities that are otherwise very different from each other likewise indicates that existence is composed of a variety of elements capable of forming a variety of combinations.

Blaga discusses how the Anonymous Fund concept differs from and is similar to the theistic conception of God. Both are conceived as being the source of all else, the most central of all existents, and the greatest existent, to the extent that their own existence surpasses all others in both extent and in quality. However, Blaga states that he hesitates to use the term God to refer to his conception of the central metaphysical entity both because there are significant differences between his own conception and that of traditional theology, and because he believes it impossible to know whether the attributes usually ascribed to God apply to the Anonymous Fund. He grants that the term “God” could be used as a synonym for the Anonymous Fund, since according to his metaphysics there is nothing in existence that is more central than the Anonymous Fund. But Blaga will not even affirm that the Fund is a being in the usual sense, saying rather that conceiving it thus is merely a “crutch” used by the understanding.

Blaga sees the product of self-reproduction of the Anonymous Fund as necessarily differentiated from the Fund itself in order to preserve the order of the cosmos. This differentiation is accomplished by the Fund in order to achieve a specific goal. The goal and benefits of differentiated creation include: (1) facilitation of the fulfillment of the Fund’s generative nature, (2) the avoidance of genesis of innumerable identical “hypostases,” and (3) the avoidance of genesis of complex, indivisible, and indestructible existents that would have too great an autarchic potential, (4) the generation of complex existents that do not infringe upon numbers 2 and 3 above, (5) the genesis of an immense variety of existents and beings, (6) a proportioning of existents between those that are simple and those that are more complex, and (7) the generation of beings with cognitive capacity while at the same time censoring that capacity so as to protect both the beings and the order of the universe. Blaga believes that his proposal shows that the Anonymous Fund has employed a means of genesis that achieves a maximum number of advantages through the employment of a minimum number of measures.

He states that the existence of dis-analogy between Creator and creation is paradoxical. It is paradoxical because the expected result of an Anonymous Fund as postulated by Blaga would be the production of other entities like itself, the production of identical self-replications. Blaga finds it surprising but empirically evident that this self-replication does not take place. The explanation for this surprising nonoccurrence is the necessity of thwarting “theo-geneses” in order to preserve the necessary order of existence. Thus the apparent paradox is only an initial paradox, which is seen to be resolvable through the means of minus-cognition (as discussed in Blaga’s epistemology).

In Blaga’s metaphysics there are two important measures employed by the Anonymous Fund in preservation of cosmic equilibrium. One of these has already been discussed: differentiated creation. The other is transcendent censorship. While many metaphysicians have struggled with the question “What is the nature of existence?” and many epistemologists have struggled with “What are the methods of knowledge?” relatively few have sought to answer the question “What is it that impedes our answering of these fundamental questions?” Blaga insightfully observes that this “prohibitive factor” is one of the factors of existence that philosophy has yet to reckon with.

Blaga proposes that ultimate questions are difficult to answer, and in some sense unanswerable, because in addition to the ontological limit that the Anonymous Fund has imposed upon creation (through the means of differentiated creation), the Fund has also imposed a cognitive limit on creation. This was done at the time of the creation of the cosmos, and is now an inherent aspect, affecting all modes of cognition. Blaga refers to this limit as “transcendent censorship.” This censorship is accomplished via a network of factors, including obligatory epistemic reliance on the concrete, the intervention of cognitive structures, the resulting “dissimulation of the transcendent,” and “the illusion of adequacy.” Transcendent censorship not only prevents humans from having positive-adequate knowledge of the mysteries of existence, it prevents them from having “positive-adequate” knowledge of any object of cognition whatsoever. Blaga points out that this view has an interesting difference from the Kantian/neo-Kantian view. In Kant’s epistemology, existence is passive in the cognitive event; according to Blaga’s theory, existence is active in preventing itself from being known.

According to Blaga, the result of transcendent censorship is that all human knowledge is either dissimulation (in which objects of cognition are represented as being other than they really are), or negative cognition (in which antinomian elements of a cognitive problem are reconciled through the employment of a heuristic “theory idea,” which leads to a deepened understanding of the problem without resulting in its complete elimination), or a combination of these. This does not indicate that Blaga is a skeptic, however. Even the “mysteries” of existence are approachable through the strategy that Blaga names “luciferic cognition,” although they are not actually reachable.

The reasons that the Anonymous Fund would impose censorship upon its creation are similar to the reasons for its dissimulation of creation. Blaga lists the following four reasons for transcendent censorship: (1) Human possession of perfect knowledge would upset the equilibrium of existence by bestowing perfection on limited beings. (2) Human possession of perfect knowledge might threaten the benign governance of the universe by introducing the possibility of a human cognitive rival to the Anonymous Fund. (3) Possession of absolute knowledge would ossify the human spirit, quenching human creativity. (4) Censorship spurs human creativity and exertion, giving humanity its raison d’etre. To this list could be added the explanation that human creativity is one indirect outlet of the creativity of the Anonymous Fund, and anything that lessens human creativity is an attack on the creative intentions of the Fund.

The responsibility for the human inability to arrive at an absolute understanding of existence therefore rests squarely upon the Anonymous Fund, for benevolent reasons. This is in striking contrast to the philosophical system of Descartes, wherein God's righteousness and benevolence are made the foundation of all sure knowledge. In Blaga's system, the benevolence and wisdom of the Anonymous Fund result in the prevention of sure knowledge.

It is clear that Blaga’s metaphysical system can say relatively little about the actual structure of the universe, because according to this system such knowledge is structurally excluded from human cognition. Blaga’s system does allow for metaphysical postulation, however, and these postulates can be supported or substantiated by experience and by pragmatic arguments. Thus Blaga justifies himself in asserting that the cosmos has a center, and that this center is the Anonymous Fund.

Blaga does take stands on several of the standard issues of cosmology. He rejects both naive realism and subjective idealism (a la Berkeley), opting for a neo-Kantian critical realism. With regards to the monism-pluralism controversy, Blaga is clearly a pluralist. While the cosmos is a result of one single entity, and is composed of pieces emitted from that one entity, these pieces (the differentials) are separate, distinct entities in their own right. They are permanent and unchanging, and are the building blocks of all else that exists. Although Blaga is a realist, he is not a materialist. Differentials are not material, but rather are submaterial. They underlie all material existents, but underlie nonmaterial realities as well.

According to Blaga, humanity is, in a sense, the very pinnacle of the Anonymous Fund’s creation, because the human consciousness is the most complex organization of differentials it has permitted. There is also another sense in which humanity is the pinnacle of creation: more than any other complex created existent, humanity has the ability to further the Fund's own creative activity. Humans are naturally creative, and their creations can be viewed as secondary creations of the Anonymous Fund.

Human existence is characterized by two modes of existence, the “paradisaic” mode, which is the normal state of life in the world, and the “luciferic” mode, which is life lived in the presence of mystery and for the purpose of “revealing” it (grappling with it; trying to make it understandable). The latter mode results in an “ontological mutation” that is unique in the universe and essential to full humanness. “Mystery” is a result of the protective limits imposed on creation by the Anonymous Fund (transcendent censorship and the discontinuity between creator and creation). Through these means the Fund bestows upon humanity a destiny and a purpose in life: humanity’s purpose is to create; its destiny is to strive (through creating) to reveal the mysteries of existence.

Since the mysteries of existence are not ultimately fathomable by humans, humanity is doomed to a continual striving to reveal them, sometimes experiencing partial successes, but never reaching the ultimate goal. In Blaga's vision, human history becomes an endless, permanent creative state, never reaching its goal, but never exhausting its source of motivation and meaningfulness either. Through this artifice the Anonymous Fund gives to humanity a goal, a purpose, and gives it the unique historicity that makes it so culturally rich. Thus historicity is one of the greatest dimensions of human existence. It is seen to be a vital aspect of “luciferic” humanness. Likewise, the “principle of conservation of mystery,” which was made part of the very fiber of existence in order to preserve the centrality of the Anonymous Fund from the ambitions of created beings, is seen to be one of the chief metaphysical conditions of the historicity of humanity.

This description highlights the two opposing components that shape human history: the inner human desire to creatively reveal mystery, and the necessity of the Anonymous Fund to thwart this desire. This desire and its lack of fulfillment are here seen as essential both to the historicity of humanity and to full humanness, since they provide the peaks and valleys of failed attempts and renewed aspirations toward the absolute of which human history is composed.

The human inability to have absolute knowledge is often viewed as a failure, shortcoming, or handicap. Blaga reverses this evaluation, making human subjectivity and relativity essential to humanness and the glory of the human situation: according to Blaga, these factors give humanity its role and place in a great ontological scheme. Humans are not the deplorable victims of their own limits that they are sometimes supposed to be; rather, they are the servants of a system that is so great it surpasses them.

The final question of cosmology might be, “Is there anything beyond this cosmos?” Transcendent censorship does not prevent Blaga from having an answer to this question. All that exists is either one of two things: a structure of differentials emitted by the Anonymous Fund, or the Anonymous Fund itself. The cosmos is composed of differentials, as discussed above. The Fund, on the other hand, is not composed of differentials. Therefore the Anonymous Fund is not part of the cosmos. The answer to this question, then, is that there is something “beyond” the cosmos, but only one thing: the Anonymous Fund.

5. Other Philosophical Issues

From this sketch of Blaga’s epistemology and metaphysics one can infer the major themes and directions of the rest of his philosophy. His philosophy of culture elevates culture to the pinnacle of human existence. Culture is a product of the human drive to creatively “reveal” the mysteries of reality and the thwarting of this drive by the Anonymous Fund. Its creativity is an extension of the creativity of the Fund itself, and lends beauty and meaning to human existence. In his philosophy of history he describes humans as historical beings who derive their meaningfulness through living in the face of the unknown, wrestling with it, and conquering it, only to find that it rises up again, providing ever new mountains to climb. Human history is a record of a long series of only partially successful attempts to master our world. (It can be seen that history and culture are closely related, both as subjects and as themes in Blaga’s oeuvre.)

Blaga’s attitude towards science is fairly remarkable considering the positivistic philosophical currents of the early 20th century. He has a great appreciation for science as a cognitive approach that combines both paradisaic and luciferic cognition. As can be anticipated, his application of his epistemology to science leads to insights similar to those of Michael Polanyi and Thomas Kuhn. His is not a critique of science, per se, but rather an explanation of how science operates, locating it within the range of human creative endeavors that aim at revealing the mysteries of existence. As such, science, like art, religion, and all other human cognitive enterprises can be successful, but only within the boundaries postulated by Blaga’s metaphysics.

Blaga views religion as yet another attempt to penetrate the mysteries of existence. Religion is perhaps the grandest of all such attempts, since it aims the highest, but it is also the most doomed, since its reach far outstretches its grasp. He argues that religion is a cultural production, which is a position that caused great animosity toward him on the part of some contemporary Romanian theologians. However, an implication of his metaphysic is that religion is a response to the transcendent Anonymous Fund, a position that is fairly harmonious with Romanian Orthodox theology. And Blaga admits that his “Anonymous Fund” could also be termed “God,” though he explains that he avoids using this term because it carries with it so much baggage.

Blaga’s primary books on philosophy of culture are the three that comprise his “Trilogy of Culture”: Orizont si stil (Horizon and Style), Spatiul mioritic (The Ewe-Space), and Geneza metaforei si sensul culturii (The Genesis of Metaphor and the Meaning of Culture). His philosophy of history is exposited together with his philosophical anthropology in Aspecte antropologice (Anthropological Aspects) and Fiinta istorica (The Historical Being), two of the books making up his “Cosmological Trilogy.” He addresses issues in the philosophy of science in Experimentul si spiritual mathematic (Experiment and the Mathematical Spirit) and Stiinta si creatie (Science and Creation). His theory of aesthetics is outlined in Arta si valoare (Art and Value), and his philosophy of religion is explained in Gandire magica si religiei (Magical Thinking and Religion) and in a set of lecture notes that were posthumously published as Curs de filosofia religiei (Curse on the Philosophy of Religion). 

6. References and Further Reading

Blaga authored many books and articles. Unfortunately, while all of his poetry and some of his theater is available in English, his philosophy remains to be translated. An anthology of fragments, which have been translated into English, with some secondary sources in English as well, is available on CD from Richard T. Allen.

a. Primary Sources

i. English

  • Blaga, Lucian, and Andrei Codrescu (trans.). At the Court of Yearning. Columbus, OH: Ohio State University Press, 1989.
  • Blaga, Lucian, and Brenda Walker (trans.). Complete Poetical Works of Lucian Blaga. Iasi, RO, Oxford, GB, and Portland, USA: Center for Romanian Studies, 2001.
  • Blaga, Lucian, and Doris Planus-Runey (trans.). Zalmoxis: Obscure Pagan. Iasi, RO, Oxford, GB, and Portland, USA: Center for Romanian Studies, 2000.
  • Interestingly, some of Blaga’s poetry, accompanied by music and visuals, is also available on YouTube.

ii. Romanian

  • Eonul dogmatic (The Dogmatic Age). Bucharest: Cartea Romaneasca, 1931.
  • Cunoasterea luciferica (Luciferic Knowledge). Sibiu: Tiparul Institutului de arte grafice “Dacia Traiana,” 1933.
  • Cenzura transcendenta: Incercare metafizica. (Transcendent Censorship: A Metaphysical Attempt). Bucharest: Cartea Româneasca, 1934.
  • Orizont si stil (Horizon and Style). Bucharest: Fundatia pentru literatura si arta “Regele Carol II,” 1935.
  • Spatiul mioritic (The Ewe-Space). Bucharest: Cartea Româneasca, 1936.
  • Geneza metaforei si sensul culturii (The Genesis of Metaphor and the Meaning of Culture). Bucharest: Fundatia pentru literatura si arta “Regele Carol II,” 1937.
  • Arta Si valoare (Art and Value). Bucharest: Fundatia pentru literatura si arta “Regele Carol II,” 1939.
  • Diferentialele divine (The Divine Differentials). Bucharest: Fundatia pentru literatura si arta “Regele Carol II,” 1940.
  • Despre gandirea magica (Concerning Magical Thinking). Bucharest: Fundatia regala pentru literatura si arta, 1941.
  • Religie si spirit (Religion and Spirit). Sibiu: Editura “Dacia Traiana,” 1942.
  • Stiinta si creatie (Science and Creation). Sibiu: Editura “Dacia Traiana,” 1942.
  • Despre constiinta filosofica (Concerning Philosophical Consciousness). Cluj-Napoca: Lito-Schildkraut, 1947.
  • Aspecte antropologice (Anthropological Aspects). Cluj-Napoca: Uniunea nationala a studentilor din Romania, Centrul studentesc Cluj, 1948.
  • Experimentul si spiritul matematic (Experiment and the Mathematical Spirit). Bucharest: Editura Stiintifica, 1969.
  • Fiinta istorica (The Historical Being). Cluj-Napoca: Editura Dacia, 1977.

iii. Other Languages

  • Orizzonte e stile, ed. Antonio Banfi. Milano: Minuziano Editore, 1946.
  • Zum Wesen der rumanischen Volkseele, ed. Mircea Flonta. Bucharest: Editura Minerva, 1982.
  • L’Eon dogmatique, L’Age d’Homme, trans. Jessie Marin, Raoul Marin, Mariana Danesco, and Georges Danesco. Lausanne: Editions l'Age d'Home, 1988.
  • L’Eloge du village roumain, ed. Jessie Marin and Raoul Marin. Paris: Librairie du Savoir, 1989.
  • L’Etre historique, trans. Mariana Danesco. Paris: Librairie du Savoir, 1990.
  • Les Differentielles divines, trans. Thomas Bazin, Raoul Marin, and Georges Danesco. Paris: Librairie du Savoir, 1990.
  • La trilogie de la connaissance, trans. Raul Marin and Georges Piscoci-Danescu. Paris: Librairie du Savoir, 1992.
  • Trilogia della cultura: Lo spazio mioritico, trans. Ricardo Busetto and Marco Cugno. Alessandria, IT: Editionni dell’Orso, 1994.

b. Secondary Sources in English

  • Bejan, Cristina. "The Paradox of the Young Generation in Inter-war Romania,” Slovo, 18:2 (Autumn 2006): 115-128.
  • Botez, Angela. "Comparativist and Valuational Reflections on Blaga's Philosophy," Revue Roumaine de Philosophie et Logique 40 (1996): 153–62.
  • Botez, Angela. "Lucian Blaga and the Complementary Spiritual Paradigm of the 20th Century," Revue Roumaine de Philosophie et Logique 37 (1993): 51–55.
  • Botez, Angela. "The Postmodern Antirepresentationalism (Polanyi, Blaga, Rorty)," Revue Roumaine de Philosophie et Logique 41 (1997): 59–70.
  • Eliade, Mircea. “Rumanian Philosophy,” in Encyclopedia of Philosophy, ed. Paul Edwards (New York: Macmillan and the Free Press, 1967).
  • Flonta, Mircea. “Blaga, Lucian.” In Routledge Encyclopedia of Philosophy Online, edited by E. Craig. London: Routledge, 2004, (accessed January 3, 2006).
  • Hitchins, Keith. “Introduction to Complete Poetical Works of Lucian Blaga, translated by Brenda Walker, 23–48. Iasi, RO, Oxford, Portland, USA: Center for Romanian Studies, 2001.
  • Isac, Ionut. “Considerations on some Historical and Contemporary Issues in Lucian Blagas Metaphysics,” Journal for the Study of Religions and Ideologies 7:19, spring 2008, 184-202.
  • Jones, Michael S. “Culture and Interreligious Understanding according to the Romanian Philosopher Lucian Blaga,” Journal of Ecumenical Studies 45: 1, winter 2010, 97-112.
  • Jones, Michael S. “Culture as Religion and Religion as Culture in the Philosophy of Lucian Blaga,” Journal for the Study of Religions and Ideologies no. 15, winter 2006, 66-87.
  • Jones, Michael S. “The Metaphysics of Religion: Lucian Blaga and contemporary philosophy.” Teaneck and Madison, NJ: Fairleigh Dickenson University Press, 2006.
  • Munteanu, Bazil. “Lucian Blaga, Metaphysician of Mystery and Philosopher of Culture,” Revue Roumaine de Philosophie et Logique 39 (1995): 43–46.
  • Nemoianu, Virgil. “Mihai Sora and the Traditions of Romanian Philosophy,” Review of Metaphysics 43 (March 1990): 591–605.
  • Nemoianu, Virgil. “A Theory of the Secondary: Literature, Progress, and Reaction.” Baltimore: Johns Hopkins University Press, 1989, 153 –170.

Author Information

Michael S. Jones
Liberty University
U. S. A.

Russian Philosophy

RussiaThis article provides a historical survey of Russian philosophers and thinkers. It emphasizes Russian epistemological concerns rather than ontological and ethical concerns, hopefully without neglecting or disparaging them. After all, much work in ethics, at least during the Soviet period, strictly supported the state, such that what is taken to be good is often that which helps secure the goals of Soviet society. Unlike most other major nations, political events in Russia's history played large roles in shaping its periods of philosophical development.

Various conceptions of Russian philosophy have led scholars to locate its start at different moments in history and with different individuals. However, few would dispute that there was a religious orientation to Russian thought prior to Peter the Great (around 1700) and that professional, secular philosophy—in which philosophical issues are considered on their own terms without explicit appeal to their utility—arose comparatively recently in the country's history.

Despite the difficulties, we can distinguish five major periods in Russian philosophy. In the first period (The Period of Philosophical Remarks), there is a clear emergence of something resembling what we would now characterize as philosophy. However, religious and political conservativism imposed many restrictions on the dissemination of philosophy during this time. The second period (The Philosophical Dark Age) was marked by much forced silence of the Russian philosophical community. Many subsumed philosophy under the scope of religion or politics, and the discipline was evaluated primarily by whether it was of any utility. The third period (The Emergence of Professional Philosophy) showed an increase in many major Russian thinkers, many of which were influenced by philosophers of the West, such as Plato, Kant, Spinoza, Hegel, and Husserl. The rise of Russian philosophy that was not beholden to religion and politics also began in this period. In the fourth period (The Soviet Era), there were significant concerns about the primacy of the natural sciences. This spawned, for example, the debate between those who thought all philosophical problems would be resolved by the natural sciences (the mechanists) and those who defended the existence of philosophy as a separate discipline (the Deborinists). The fifth period (The Post-Soviet Era) is surely too recent to fully describe. However, there has certainly been a rediscovery of the works of the religious philosophers that were strictly forbidden in the past.

Table of Contents

  1. Overview of the Problem
    1. Masaryk
    2. Lossky and Zenkovsky
    3. Shpet
    4. Concluding Remarks
  2. Historical Periods
    1. The Period of Philosophical Remarks (c.1755-1825)
    2. The Philosophical Dark Age (c. 1825-1860)
    3. The Emergence of Professional Philosophy (c. 1860-1917)
    4. The Soviet Era (1917-1991)
    5. The Post-Soviet Era (1991-)
  3. Concluding Remarks
  4. References and Further Reading

1. Overview of the Problem

The very notion of Russian philosophy poses a cultural-historical problem. No consensus exists on which works it encompasses and which authors made decisive contributions. To a large degree, a particular ideological conception of Russian philosophy, of what constitutes its essential traits, has driven the choice of inclusions. In turn, the various conceptions have led scholars to locate the start of Russian philosophy at different moments and with different individuals.

a. Masaryk

Among the first to deal with this issue was T. Masaryk (1850-1937), a student of Franz Brentano's and later the first president of the newly formed Czechoslovakia. Masaryk, following the lead of a pioneering Russian scholar E. Radlov (1854-1928), held that Russian thinkers have historically given short shrift to epistemological issues in favor of ethical and political discussions. For Masaryk, even those who were indebted to the ethical teachings of Immanuel Kant (1724-1804), scarcely understood and appreciated his epistemological criticism, which they viewed as essentially subjectivistic. True, Masaryk does comment that the Russian mind is "more inclined" to mythology than the Western European—a position that could lead us to conclude that he viewed the Russian mind as in some way innately different from others. However, he makes clear that the Russian predilection for unequivocal acceptance or total negation of a viewpoint stems, at least to a large degree, from the native Orthodox faith. Church teachings had "accustomed" the Russian mind to accept doctrinaire revelation without criticism. For this reason, Masaryk certainly placed the start of Russian philosophy no earlier than the 19th century with the historiosophical musings of P. Chaadaev (1794-1856), who not surprisingly also pinned blame for the country's position in world affairs on its Orthodox faith.

b. Lossky and Zenkovsky

Others, particularly ethnic Russians, alarmed by what they took to be Masaryk's implicit denigration of their intellectual character, have denied that Russian philosophy suffered from a veritable absence of epistemological inquiry. For N. Lossky (1870-1965), Russian philosophers admittedly have, as a rule, sought to relate their investigations, regardless of the specific concern, to ethical problems. This, together with a prevalent epistemological view that externality is knowable—and indeed through an immediate grasping or intuition—has given Russian philosophy a form distinct from much of modern Western philosophy. Nevertheless, the relatively late emergence of independent Russian philosophical thought was a result of the medieval "Tatar yoke" and of the subsequent cultural isolation of Russia until Peter the Great's opening to the West. Even then, Russian thought remained heavily indebted to developments in Germany until the emergence of 19th century Slavophilism with I. Kireyevsky (1806-56) and A. Khomiakov (1804-60).

Even more emphatically than Lossky, V. Zenkovsky (1881-1962) denied the absence of epistemological inquiry in Russian thought. In his eyes, Russian philosophy rejected the primacy accorded, at least since Kant, to the theory of knowledge over ethical and ontological issues. A widespread, though not unanimous, view among Russian philosophers, according to Zenkovsky, is ontologism (that is, that knowledge plays but a secondary role in human existential affairs). Yet, whereas many Russians historically have advocated such an ontologism, it is by no means unique to that nation. More characteristic of Russian philosophy, for Zenkovsky, is its anthropocentrism (that is, a concern with the human condition and humanity's ultimate fate). For this reason, philosophy in Russia has historically been expressed in terms noticeably different from those in the West. Furthermore, like Lossky, Zenkovsky saw the comparatively late development of Russian philosophy as a result of the country's isolation and subsequent infatuation with Western modes of thought until the 19th century. Thus, although Zenkovsky placed Kireyevsky only at the "threshold" of a mature, independent "Russian philosophy" (understood as a system), the former believed it possible to trace the first independent stirrings back to G. Skovoroda (1722-94), who, strictly speaking, was the first Russian philosopher.

Largely as a result of rejecting the primacy of epistemology and the Cartesian model of methodological inquiry, Lossky (and Zenkovsky even more) included within "Russian philosophy" figures whose views would hardly qualify for inclusion within contemporary Western treatises in the history of philosophy. During the Soviet period, Russian scholars appealed to the Marxist doctrine linking intellectual thought to the socio-economic base for their own rather broad notion of philosophy. Any attempt at confining their history to what passes for professionalism today in the West was simply dismissed as "bourgeois." In this way, such literary figures as Dostoyevsky and Tolstoy were routinely included in texts, though just as routinely condemned for their own supposedly bourgeois mentality. Western studies devoted to the history of Russian philosophy have largely since their emergence acquiesced in this acceptance of a broad understanding of philosophy. F. Copleston, for example, conceded that "for historical reasons" philosophy in Russia tended to be informed by a socio-political orientation. Such an apology for his book-length study can be seen as somewhat self-serving, since he recognizes that philosophy as a theoretical discipline never flourished in Russia. Likewise, A. Walicki fears viewing the history of Russian philosophy from the contemporary Western technical standpoint would result in an impoverished picture populated with wholly unoriginal authors. Obviously, one cannot write a history of some discipline if that discipline lacks content!

c. Shpet

Of those seemingly unafraid to admit the historical poverty of philosophical thought in Russia, Gustav Shpet (1879-1937) stands out not only for his vast historical erudition but also because of his own original philosophical contributions. Shpet, almost defiantly, characterized the intellectual life of Russia as rooted in an "elemental ignorance." Unlike Masaryk, however, Shpet did not view this dearth as stemming from Russia's Orthodox faith but from his country's linguistic isolation. The adopted language of the Bulgars lacked a cultural and intellectual tradition. Without a heritage by which to appreciate ideas, intellectual endeavors were valued for their utility alone. Although the government saw no practical benefit in it, the Church initially found philosophy useful as a weapon to safeguard its position. This toleration extended no further, and certainly the clerical authorities countenanced no divergence or independent creativity. With Peter the Great's governmental reforms, the state saw the utility of education and championed those and only those disciplines that served a bureaucratic and apologetic function. After the successful military campaign against Napoleon, many young Russian officers had their first experience of Western European culture and returned to Russia with incipient revolutionary ideas that, in a relatively short time, found expression in the abortive Decembrist Uprising of 1825. Finally, towards the end of the 1830s a new group, a "nihilistic intelligentsia," appeared that preached a toleration of cultural forms, including philosophy, but only insofar as they served the "people." Such was the fate of philosophy in Russia that it was virtually never viewed as anything but a tool or weapon and had to incessantly demonstrate this utility on fear of losing its legitimacy. Shpet concludes that philosophy as knowledge, as being of value for its own sake, was never given a chance.

d. Concluding Remarks

Regardless of the date from which we place the start of Russian philosophy and its first practitioner—and we will have more to say on this topic as we go—few would dispute the religious orientation of Russian thought prior to Peter the Great and that professional secular philosophy arose comparatively recently in the country's history. If we are to avoid a double standard, one for "Western" thought and another for Russian, which is not merely self-serving but also condescending, then we must examine the historical record for indisputable instances of philosophical thought that would be recognized as such regardless of where they originated. Although, on the whole, our inclusions, omissions, and evaluations may more closely resemble those of Shpet than, say, Lossky, we thereby need not invoke any metaphysical historical scheme to justify them.

How precisely to subdivide the history of Russian philosophy has also been a subject of some controversy. In his pioneering study from 1898, A. Vvedensky (see below), Russia's foremost neo-Kantian, found three periods up to his time. Of course, in light of 20th century events his list must be revisited, reexamined, and expanded. We can readily discern five periods in Russian philosophy, the last of which is still too recent to characterize. Unlike most major nations, specific extra-philosophical (namely, political) events clearly played a major role, if not the sole role, in terminating a period.

2. Historical Periods

a. The Period of Philosophical Remarks (c.1755-1825)

Although one can find scattered remarks of a philosophical nature in Russian writings before the mid-eighteenth century, these are at best of marginal interest to the professionally trained philosopher. For the most part, these remarks were not intended to stand as rational arguments in support of a position. Even in the ecclesiastic academies, the thin scholastic veneer of the accepted texts was merely a traditional schematic device, a relic from the time when the only appropriate texts available were Western. For whatever reason, only with the opening of the nation's first university in Moscow in 1755 do we see the emergence of something resembling philosophy, as we use that term today. Even then, however, the floodgates did not burst wide open. The first occupant of the chair of philosophy, N. Popovsky (1730-1760), was more suited to the teaching of poetry and rhetoric, to which chair he was shunted after one brief year.

Sensing the dearth of adequately trained native personnel, the government invited two Germans to the university, thus initiating a practice that would continue well into the next century. The story of the first ethnic Russian to hold the professorship in philosophy for any significant length of time is itself indicative of the precarious existence of philosophy in Russia for much of its history. Having already obtained a magister's degree in 1760 with a thesis entitled "Rassuzhdenie o bessmertii dushi chelovechoj" ("A Treatise on the Immortality of the Human Soul"), Dmitry Anichkov (1733-1788) submitted in 1769 a dissertation on natural religion. Anichkov's dissertation was found to contain atheistic opinions and was subjected to a lengthy 18-year investigation. Legend has it that the dissertation was publicly burned, although there is no firm evidence for this. As was common at the time, Anichkov used Wolffian philosophy manuals and during his first years taught in Latin.

Another notable figure at this time was S. Desnitsky (~1740-1789), who taught jurisprudence at Moscow University. Desnitsky attended university in Glasgow, where he studied under Adam Smith (1723-1790) and became familiar with the works of David Hume (1711-1776). The influence of Smith and British thought in general is evident in memoranda from February 1768 that Desnitsky wrote on government and public finance. Some of these ideas, in turn, appeared virtually verbatim in a portion of Catherine the Great's famous Nakaz, or Instruction, published in April of that year.

Also in 1768 appeared Ya. Kozelsky's Filosoficheskie predlozhenija (Philosophical Propositions), an unoriginal but noteworthy collection of numbered statements on a host of topics, not all of which were philosophical in a technical, narrow sense. By his own admission, the material dealing with "theoretical philosophy" was drawn from the Wolffians, primarily Baumeister, and that dealing with "moral philosophy" from the French Enlightenment thinkers, primarily Rousseau, Montesquieu, and Helvetius. The most interesting feature of the treatise is its acceptance of a social contract, of an eight-hour workday, the explicit rejection of great disparities of wealth and its silence on religion as a source of morality. Nevertheless, in his "theoretical philosophy," Kozelsky (1728-1795) rejected atomism and the Newtonian conception of the possibility of empty space.

During Catherine's reign, plans were made to establish several universities in addition to that in Moscow. Of course, nothing came of these. Moscow University itself had a difficult time attracting a sufficient number of students, most of whom came from poorer families. Undoubtedly, given the state of the Russian economy and society, the virtually ubiquitous attitude was that the study of philosophy was a sheer luxury with no utilitarian value. In terms of general education, the government evidently concluded that sending students abroad offered a better investment than spending large sums at home where the infrastructure needed much work and time to develop. Unfortunately, although there were some who returned to Russia and played a role in the intellectual life of the country, many more failed to complete their studies for a variety of reasons, including falling into debt. Progress, however, skipped a beat in 1796 when Catherine's son and successor, Paul, ordered the recall of all Russian students studying abroad.

Despite its relatively small number of educational institutions, Russia felt a need to invite foreign scholars to help staff these establishments. One of the scholars, J. Schaden (1731-1797), ran a private boarding school in Moscow in addition to teaching philosophy at the university. The most notorious incident from these early years, however, involves the German Ludwig Mellman, who in the 1790s introduced Kant's thought into Russia. Mellman's advocacy found little sympathy even among his colleagues at Moscow University, and in a report to the Tsar the public prosecutor charged Mellman with "mental illness." Not only was Mellman dismissed from his position, but he was forced to leave Russia as well.

Under the initiative of the new Tsar, Alexander I, two new universities were opened in 1804. With them, the need for adequately trained professors again arose. Once more the government turned to Germany, and, with the dislocations caused by the Napoleonic Wars, Russia stood in an excellent position to reap an intellectual harvest. Unfortunately, many of these invited scholars left little lasting impact on Russian thought. For example, one of the most outstanding, Johann Buhle (1763-1821), had already written a number of works on the history of philosophy before taking up residence in Moscow. Yet, once in Russia, his literary output plummeted, and his ignorance of the local language certainly did nothing to extend his influence.

Nonetheless, the sudden influx of German scholars, many of whom were intimately familiar with the latest philosophical developments, acted as an intellectual tonic on others. The arrival of the Swiss physicist Franz Bronner (1758-1850) at the new University of Kazan may have introduced Kant's epistemology to the young future mathematician Lobachevsky. The Serb physicist, A. Stoikovich (1773-1832), who taught at Kharkov University, prepared a text for class use in which the content was arranged in conformity with Kant's categories. One of the earliest Russian treatments of a philosophical topic, however, was A. Lubkin's two "Pis'ma o kriticheskoj filosofii" ("Letters on Critical Philosophy") from 1805. Lubkin (1770/1-1815), who at the time taught at the Petersburg Military Academy, criticized Kant's theory of space and time for its agnostic implications saying that we obtain our concepts of space and time from experience. Likewise, in 1807 a professor of mathematics at Kharkov University, T. Osipovsky (1765-1832), delivered a subsequently published speech "O prostranstve i vremeni" ("On Space and Time"), in which he questioned whether, given the various considerations, Kant's position was the only logical conclusion possible. Assuming the Leibnizian notion of a preestablished harmony, we can uphold all of Kant's specific observations concerning space and time without concluding that they exist solely within our cognitive faculty. Osipovsky went on to make a number of other perceptive criticisms of Kant's position, though Kant's German critics already voiced many of these during his lifetime.

In the realm of social and political philosophy, as understood today, the most interesting and arguably the most sophisticated document from the period of the Russian Enlightenment is A. Kunitsyn's Pravo estestvennoe (Natural Law). In his summary text consisting of 590 sections, Kunitsyn (1783-1840) clearly demonstrated the influence of Kant and Rousseau, holding that rational dictates concerning human conduct form moral imperatives, which we feel as obligations. Since each of us possesses reason, we must always be treated morally as ends, never as means toward an end. In subsequent paragraphs, Kunitsyn elaborated his conception of natural rights, including his belief that among these rights is freedom of thought and expression. His outspoken condemnation of serfdom, however, is not one that the Russian authorities could either have missed or passed over. Shortly after the text reached their attention, all attainable copies were confiscated, and Kunitsyn himself was dismissed from his teaching duties at St. Petersburg University in March 1821.

Another scholar associated with St. Petersburg University was Aleksandr I. Galich (1783-1848). Sent to Germany for further education, he there became acquainted with the work of Friedrich Wilhelm Joseph von Schelling (1775-1854). With his return to Russia in 1813, he was appointed adjunct professor of philosophy at the Pedagogical Institute in St. Petersburg; and in 1819, when the institute was transformed into a university, Galich was named to the chair of philosophy. His teaching career, however, was short-lived, for in 1821 Galich was charged with atheism and revolutionary sympathies. Although stripped of teaching duties, he continued to draw a full salary until 1837. Galich's importance lays not so much in his own quasi-Schellingian views as his pioneering treatments of the history of philosophy, aesthetics and philosophical anthropology. His two-volume Istorija filosofskikh sistem (History of Philosophical Systems) from 1818-19 concluded with an exposition of Schelling's position and contained quite probably the first discussion in Russian of G.W.F. Hegel (1770-1831) and, in particular, of his Science of Logic. Galich's Opyt nauki izjashchnogo (An Attempt at a Science of the Beautiful) from 1825 is certainly among the first Russian treatises in aesthetics. For Galich, the beautiful is the sensuous manifestation of truth and as such is a sub-discipline within philosophy. His 1834 work, Kartina cheloveka (A Picture of Man), marked the first Russian foray into philosophical anthropology. For Galich all "scientific" disciplines, including theology, are in need of an anthropological foundation; and, moreover, such a foundation must recognize the unity of the human aspects and functions, be they corporeal or spiritual.

The increasing religious and political conservativism that marked Tsar Alexander's later years imposed onerous restrictions on the dissemination of philosophy, both in the classroom and in print. By the time of the Tsar's death in 1825, most reputable professors of philosophy had already been administratively silenced or cowed into compliance. At the end of that year, the aborted coup known as the "Decembrist Uprising"—many of whose leaders had been exposed to the infection of Western European thought—only hardened the basically anti-intellectual attitude of the new Tsar Nicholas. Shortly after I. Davydov (1792/4-1863), hardly either an original or a gifted thinker, had given his introductory lecture "O vozmozhnosti filosofii kak nauki" ("On the Possibility of Philosophy as Science") in May 1826 as professor of philosophy at Moscow University, the chair was temporarily abolished and Davydov shifted to teaching mathematics.

b. The Philosophical Dark Age (c. 1825-1860)

The reign of Nicholas I (1825-1855) was marked by intellectual obscurantism and an enforced philosophical silence, unusual even by Russian standards. The Minister of Public Education, A. Shishkov, blamed the Decembrist Uprising explicitly on the contagion of foreign ideas. To prevent their spread, he and Nicholas's other advisors restricted the access of non-noble youths to higher education and had the tsar enact a comprehensive censorship law that held publishers legally responsible even after the official censor's approval of a manuscript. Yet the scope of this new "cast-iron statute" was conceived so broadly that even at the time it was remarked that the Lord's Prayer could be interpreted as revolutionary speech. While prevented an outlet in a dedicated professional manner at the universities, philosophy found energetic, though amateurish, expression first in the faculties of medicine and physics and then later in fashionable salons and social gatherings—where discipline, rigor and precision were held of little value. During these years, those empowered to teach philosophy at the universities struggled with the task of justifying the very existence of their discipline, not in terms of a search for truth, but as having some social utility. Given the prevailing climate of opinion, this proved to be a hard sell. The news of revolutions in Western Europe in 1848 was the last straw. All talk of reform and social change was simply ruled impermissible, and travel beyond the Empire's borders was forbidden. Finally, in 1850, the minister of education took the step that was thought too extreme in the 1820s: in order to protect Russia from the latest philosophical systems, and therefore intellectual infection, the teaching of philosophy in public universities was simply to be eliminated. Logic and psychology were permitted, but only in the safe hands of theology professors. This situation persisted until 1863, when, in the aftermath of the humiliating Crimean War, philosophy reentered the public academic arena. Even then, however, severe restrictions on its teaching persisted until 1889!

Nevertheless, despite the oppressive atmosphere, some independent philosophizing emerged during the Nicholas years. At first, Schelling's influence dominated abstract discussions, particularly those concerning the natural sciences and their place with regard to the other academic disciplines. However, the two chief Schellingians of the era—D. Vellansky (1774-1847) and M. Pavlov (1793-1840)—both valued German Romanticism, more for its sweeping conclusions than for either its arguments or its being the logical outcome of a philosophical development that had begun with Kant. Though both Vellansky and Pavlov penned a considerable number of works, none of them would find a place within today's philosophy curriculum. Slightly later, in the 1830s and '40s, the discussion turned to Hegel's system, again with great enthusiasm but with little understanding either with what Hegel actually meant or with the philosophical backdrop of his writings. Not surprisingly, Hegel's own self-described "voyage of discovery," the Phenomenology of Spirit, remained an unknown text. Suffice it to say that, but for the dearth of original competent investigations at this time, the mere mention of the Stankevich and the Petrashevsky circles, the Slavophiles and the Westernizers, etc. in a history of philosophy text would be regarded a travesty.

Nevertheless, amid the darkness of official obscurantism, there were a few brief glimmers of light. In his 1833 Vvedenie v nauku filosofii (Introduction to the Science of Philosophy), F. Sidonsky (1805-1873) treated philosophy as a rational discipline independent of theology. Although conterminous with theology, Sidonsky regarded philosophy as both a necessary and a natural searching of the human mind for answers that faith alone cannot adequately supply. By no means did he take this to mean that faith and reason conflict. Revelation provides the same truths, but the path taken, though dogmatic and therefore rationally unsatisfying, is considerably shorter. Much more could be said about Sidonsky's introductory text, but both it and its author were quickly consigned to the margins of history. Notwithstanding his book's desired recognition in some secular circles, Sidonsky soon after its publication was shifted first from philosophy to the teaching of French and then simply dismissed from the St. Petersburg Ecclesiastic Academy in 1835. This time it was the clerical authorities who found his book, it was said, insufficiently rigorous from the official religious standpoint. Sidonsky spent the next 30 years (until the re-introduction of philosophy in the universities) as a parish priest in the Russian capital.

Among those who most resolutely defended the autonomy of philosophy during this "Dark Age" were O. Novitsky (1806-1884) and I. Mikhnevich (1809-1885), both of whom taught for a period at the Kiev Ecclesiastic Academy. Although neither was a particularly outstanding thinker and left no enduring works on the perennial philosophical problems, both stand out for refusing simply to subsume philosophy to religion or politics. Novitsky in 1834 accepted the professorship in philosophy at the new Kiev University, where he taught until the government's abolition of philosophy, after which he worked as a censor. Mikhnevich, on the other hand, became an administrator.

One of the most interesting pieces of philosophical analysis from this time came from another Kiev scholar, S. Gogotsky (1813-1889). In his undergraduate thesis "Kriticheskij vzgljad na filosofiju Kanta" ("A Critical Look at Kant's Philosophy") from 1847, Gogotsky approached his topic from a moderate and informed Hegelianism, unlike that of his more vocal but dilettantish contemporaries. For Gogotsky, Kant's thought represented a distinct improvement over the positions of empiricism and rationalism. However, he demonstrated his own extremism through his advocacy of such ideas as that of the uncognizability of things in themselves, the rejection of the real existence of things in space and time, the sharp dichotomy between moral duty and happiness, and so on. During this "Dark Age," Gogotsky continued at Kiev University but taught pedagogy and remained silent on philosophical issues.

From our standpoint today, one of the most important characteristics of the philosophizing of the early "Kiev School" is the stress placed on the history of Western philosophy and particularly on epistemology. Mikhnevich, for example, wrote, "philosophy is the Science of consciousness... of the subject and the nature of our consciousness." Based on statements such as this, some (A.Vvedensky, A. Nikolsky) have seen the influence of Johann Gottlieb Fichte (1762-1814).

The teaching of philosophy at this time was not eliminated from the ecclesiastic academies; the separate institutions of higher education were parallel to the secular universities for those from a clerical background. Largely with good reason, the government felt secure about their political and intellectual passivity. Among the most noteworthy of the professors at an ecclesiastic academy during the Nicholaevan years was F. Golubinsky (1798-1854), who taught in Moscow. Generally recognized as the founder of the "Moscow School of Theistic Philosophy," his historical importance lies solely in his unabashed subordination of philosophy to theology and epistemology to ontology. For Golubinsky, humans seek knowledge in an attempt to recover an original diremption, a lost intimacy with the Infinite! Nevertheless, the idea of God is felt immediately within us. Owing to this immediacy, there is no need for and cannot be a proof of God's existence. Such was the tenor of "philosophical" thought in the religious institutions of the time.

At the very end of the "Dark Age" one figure—the Owl of Minerva (or was it a phoenix?)—emerged who combined the scholarly erudition of his Kiev predecessors with the dominating "ontologism" of the theistic apologists, such as Golubinsky. P. Jurkevich (1826-1874) stood with one foot in the Russian philosophical past and one in the future. Serving as the bridge between the eras, he largely defined the contours along which philosophical discussions would be shaped for the next two generations.

c. The Emergence of Professional Philosophy (c. 1860-1917)

While a professor of philosophy at the Kiev Ecclesiastic Academy, Jurkevich in 1861 caught the attention of a well-connected publisher with a long essay in the obscure house organ of the Academy attacking Chernyshevsky's materialism and anthropologism, which at the time were all the rage among Russia's youth. Having decided to re-introduce philosophy to the universities, the government, nevertheless, worried, lest a limited and controlled measure of independent thought get out of hand. The decision to appoint Jurkevich to the professorship at Moscow University, it was hoped, would serve the government's ends while yet combating fashionable radical trends.

In a spate of articles from his last three years in Kiev, Jurkevich forcefully argued in support of a number of seemingly disconnected theses but all of which demonstrated his own deep commitment to a Platonic idealism. His most familiar stance, his rejection of the popular materialism of the day, was directed not actually at metaphysical materialism but at a physicalist reductionism. Among the points Jurkevich made was that no physiological description could do justice to the revelations offered by introspective psychology and that the transformation of quantity into quality occurred not in the subject, as the materialists held, but in the interaction between the object and the subject. Jurkevich did not rule out the possibility that necessary forms conditioned this interaction, but, in keeping with the logic of this notion, he ruled out an uncognizable "thing in itself" conceived as an object without any possible subject.

Although Jurkevich already presented the scheme of his overall philosophical approach in his first article "Ideja" ("The Idea") from 1859, his last, "Razum po ucheniju Platona i opyt po ucheniju Kanta" ("Plato's Theory of Reason and Kant's Theory of Experience"), written in Moscow, is today his most readable work. In it, he concluded (as did Spinoza and Hegel before him) that epistemology cannot serve as first philosophy—that is, that a body of knowledge need not and, indeed, cannot begin by asking for the conditions of its own possibility; in Jurkevich's best-known expression: "In order to know it is unnecessary to have knowledge of knowledge itself." Kant, he held, conceived knowledge not in the traditional, Platonic sense, as knowledge of what truly is, but in a radically different sense as knowledge of the universally valid. Hence, for Kant, the goal of science was to secure useful information, whereas for Plato science secured truth.

Unfortunately, Jurkevich's style prevented a greater dissemination of his views. In his own day, his unfashionable views, cloaked as they were in scholastic language with frequent allusions to scripture, hardly endeared him to a young, secular audience. Jurkevich remained largely a figure of derision at the university. Today, it is these same qualities, together with his failure to elucidate his argument in distinctly rational terms, that make studying his writings both laborious and unsatisfying. In terms of immediate impact, he had only one student—V.Solovyov (see below). Yet, notwithstanding his meager direct impact, Jurkevic's Christian Platonism proved deeply influential until at least the Bolshevik Revolution of 1917.

Unlike Jurkevich, P. Lavrov (1823-1900), a teacher of mathematics at the Petersburg Military Academy, actively aspired to a university chair in philosophy (namely, the one in the capital when the position was restored in the early 1860s). However, the government apparently already suspected Lavrov of questionable allegiance and, despite a recommendation from a widely respected scholar (K. Kavelin), awarded the position instead to Sidonsky.

In a series of lengthy essays written when he had university aspirations, Lavrov developed a position, which he termed "anthropologism," that opposed metaphysical speculation, including the then-fashionable materialism of left-wing radicalism. Instead, he defended a simple epistemological phenomenalism that at many points bore a certain similarity to Kant's position, though without the latter's intricacies, nuances, and rigor. Essentially, Lavrov maintained that all claims regarding objects are translatable into statements about appearances or an aggregate of them. Additionally, he held that we have a collection of convictions concerning the external world, convictions whose basis lies in repeated experiential encounters with similar appearances. The indubitability of consciousness and our irresistible conviction in the reality of the external world are fundamental and irreducible. The error of both materialism and idealism, fundamentally, is the mistaken attempt to collapse one into the other. Since both are fundamental, the attempt to prove either is ill-conceived from the outset. Consistent with this skepticism, Lavrov argued that the study of "phenomena of consciousness," a "phenomenology of spirit," could be raised to a science only through introspection, a method he called "subjective." Likewise, the natural sciences, built on our firm belief in the external world, need little support from philosophy. To question the law of causality, for example, is, in effect, to undermine the scientific standpoint.

Parallel to the two principles of theoretical philosophy, Lavrov spoke of two principles underlying practical philosophy. The first is that the individual is consciously free in his worldly activity. Unlike for Kant, however, this principle is not a postulate but a phenomenal fact; it carries no theoretical implications. For Lavrov, the moral sphere is quite autonomous from the theoretical. The second principle is that of "ideal creation." Just as in the theoretical sphere we set ourselves against a real world, so in the practical sphere we set ourselves against ideals. Just as the real world is the source of knowledge, the world of our ideals serves as the motivation for action. In turning our own image of ourselves into an ideal, we create an ideal of personal dignity. Initially, the human individual conceives dignity along egoistic lines. In time, however, the individual's interaction, including competition, with others gives rise to his conception of them as having equal claims to dignity and to rights. In linking rights to human dignity, Lavrov thereby denied that animals have rights.

Of a similar intellectual bent, N. Mikhailovsky (1842-1904) was even more of a popular writer than Lavrov. Nevertheless, Mikhailovsky's importance in the history of Russian philosophy lies in his defense of the role of subjectivity in human studies. Unlike the natural sciences, the aim of which is the discovery of objective laws, the human sciences, according to Mikhailovsky, must take into account the epistemologically irreducible fact of conscious, goal-oriented activity. While not disclaiming the importance of objective laws, both Lavrov and Mikhailovsky held that social scientists must introduce a subjective, moral evaluation into their analyses. Unlike natural scientists, social scientists recognize the malleability of the laws under their investigation.

Comtean positivism, which for quite some years enjoyed considerable attention in 19th century Russia, found its most resolute and philosophically notable defender in V. Lesevich (1837-1905). Finding that it lacked a scientific grounding, Lesevich believed that positivism needed an inquiry into the principles that guide the attainment of knowledge. Such an inquiry must take for granted some body of knowledge without simply identifying itself with it. To the now-classic Hegelian charge that such a procedure amounted to not venturing into the water before learning how to swim, Lesevich replied that what was sought was not, so to speak, how to swim but, rather, the conditions that make swimming possible. In this vein, he consciously turned to the Kantian model while remaining highly critical of any talk of the a priori. In the end, Lesevich drew heavily upon psychology and empiricism for establishing the conditions of knowledge, thus leaving himself open to the charge of psychologism and relativism.

As the years passed, Lesevich moved from his early "critical realism," which abhorred metaphysical speculation, to an appreciation for the positivism of Richard Avenarius and Ernst Mach. However, this very abhorrence, which was decidedly unfashionable, as well as his political involvement somewhat limited his influence.

Undoubtedly, of the philosophical figures to emerge in the 1870s, indeed arguably in any decade, the greatest was Vladimir Solovyov (1853-1900). In fact, if we view philosophy not as an abstract, independent inquiry but as a more or less sustained intellectual conversation, then we can precisely date the start of Russian secular philosophy: 24 November 1874, the day of Solovyov's defense of his magister's dissertation, Krizis zapadnoj filosofii (The Crisis of Western Philosophy). For only from that day forward do we find a sustained discussion within Russia of philosophical issues considered on their own terms, that is, without overt appeal to their extra-philosophical ramifications, such as their religious or political implications.

After completion and defense of his magister's dissertation, Solovyov penned a highly metaphysical treatise entitled "Filosofskie nachala tsel'nogo znanija" ("Philosophical Principles of Integral Knowledge"), which he never completed. However, at approximately the same time, he also worked on what became his doctoral dissertation, Kritika otvlechennykh nachal (Critique of Abstract Principles)—the very title suggesting a Kantian influence. Although originally intended to consist of three parts, one each covering ethics, epistemology, and aesthetics, the completed work omitted the latter. For more than a decade, Solovyov remained silent on philosophical questions, preferring instead to concentrate on topical issues. When his interest was rekindled in the 1890s in preparing a second edition of his Kritika, a recognition of a fundamental shift in his views led him to recast their systemization in the form of an entirely new work, Opravdanie dobra (The Justification of the Good). Presumably, he intended to follow up his ethical investigations with respective treatises on epistemology and aesthetics. Unfortunately, Solovyov died having completed only three brief chapters of the "Theoretical Philosophy."

Solovyov's most relentless philosophical critic was B. Chicherin (1828-1904), certainly one of the most remarkable and versatile figures in Russian intellectual history. Despite his sharp differences with Solovyov, Chicherin himself accepted a modified Hegelian standpoint in metaphysics. Although viewing all of existence as rational, the rational process embodied in existence unfolds "dialectically." Chicherin, however, parted with the traditional triadic schematization of the Hegelian dialectic, arguing that the first moment consists of an initial unity of the one and the many. The second and third moments, paths, or steps are antithetical and take various forms in different spheres, such as matter and reason or universal and particular. The final moment is a fusion of the two into a higher unity.

In the social and ethical realm, Chicherin placed great emphasis on individual human freedom. Social and political laws should strive for moral neutrality, permitting the flowering of individual self-determination. In this way, he remained a staunch advocate of economic liberalism, seeing essentially no role for government intervention. The government itself had no right to use its powers either to aim at a moral ideal or to force its citizens to seek an ideal. On the other hand, the government should not use its powers to prevent the citizenry from the exercise of private morality. Despite receiving less treatment than the negative conception of freedom, Chicherin nevertheless upheld the idealist conception of positive freedom as the striving for moral perfection and, in this way, reaching the Absolute.

Another figure to emerge in the late 1870s and 1880s was the neo-Leibnizian A. Kozlov (1831- 1901), who taught at Kiev University and who called his highly developed metaphysical stance "panpsychism." As part of this stance, he, in contrast to Hume, argued for the substantial unity of the Self or I, which makes experience possible. This unity he held to be an obvious fact. Additionally, rejecting the independent existence of space and time, Kozlov held that they possessed being only in relation to thinking and sensing creatures. Like Augustine, however, Kozlov believed that God viewed time as a whole without our divisions into past, present, and future. To substantiate space and time, to attribute an objective existence to either, demands an answer to where and when to place them. Indeed, the very formulation of the problem presupposes a relation between a substantiated space or time and ourselves. Lastly, unlike Kant, Kozlov thought all judgments are analytic.

An unfortunately largely neglected figure to emerge in this period was M. Karinsky (1840- 1917), who taught philosophy at the St. Petersburg Ecclesiastic Academy. Unlike many of his contemporaries, Karinsky devoted much of his attention to logic and an analysis of arguments in Western philosophy, rather than metaphysical speculation. Unlike his contemporaries, Karinsky came to philosophy with an analytical bent rather than with a literary flair—a fact that made his writing style often decidedly torturous. True to those schooled in the Aristotleian tradition, Karinsky, like Brentano (to whom he has been compared) held that German Idealism was essentially irrationalist. Arguing against Kant, Karinsky believed that our inner states are not merely phenomenal, that the reflective self is not an appearance. Inner experience, unlike outer, yields no distinction between reality and appearance. In his general epistemology, Karinsky argued that knowledge was built on judgments, which were legitimate conclusions from premises. Knowledge, however, could be traced back to a set of ultimate unprovable, yet reliable, truths, which he called "self-evident." Karinsky argued for a pragmatic interpretation of realism, saying that something exists in another room unperceived by me means I would perceive it if I were to go into that room. Additionally, he accepted an analogical argument for the existence of other minds similar to that of John Stuart Mill and Bertrand Russell.

In his two-volume magnum opus Polozhitel'nye zadachi filosofii (The Positive Tasks of Philosophy), L. Lopatin (1855-1920), who taught at Moscow University, defended the possibility of metaphysical knowledge. He claimed that empirical knowledge is limited to appearances, whereas metaphysics yields knowledge of the true nature of things. Although Lopatin saw Hegel and Spinoza as the definitive expositors of rationalistic idealism, he rejected both for their very transformation of concrete relations into rational or logical ones. Nevertheless, Lopatin affirmed the role of reason particularly in philosophy in conscious opposition to, as he saw it, Solovyov's ultimate surrender to religion. In the first volume, he attacked materialism as itself a metaphysical doctrine that elevates matter to the status of an absolute that cannot explain the particular properties of individual things or the relation between things and consciousness. In his second volume, Lopatin distinguishes mechanical causality from "creative causality," according to which one phenomenon follows another, though with something new added to it. Despite his wealth of metaphysical speculation, quite foreign to most contemporary readers, Lopatin's observations on the self or ego derived from speculation that is not without some interest. Denying that the self has a purely empirical nature, Lopatin emphasized that the undeniable reality of time demonstrated the non-temporality of the self, for temporality could only be understood by that which is outside time. Since the self is extra-temporal, it cannot be destroyed, for that is an event in time. Likewise, in opposition to Solovyov, Lopatin held that the substantiality of the self is immediately evident in consciousness.

In the waning years of the 19th century, neo-Kantianism came to dominate German philosophy. Because of the increasing tendency to send young Russian graduate students to Germany for additional training, it should come as no surprise that that movement gained a foothold in Russia too. In one of the very few Russian works devoted to philosophy of science A. Vvedensky (1856-1925) presented, in his lengthy dissertation, a highly idealistic Kantian interpretation of the concept of matter as understood in the physics of his day. He tried therein to defend and update Kant's own work as exemplified in the Metaphysical Foundations of Natural Science. Vvedensky's book, however, attracted little attention and exerted even less influence. Much more widely recognized were his own attempts in subsequent years, while teaching at St. Petersburg University, to recast Kant's transcendental idealism in, what he called, "logicism." Without drawing any conclusions based upon the nature of space and time, Vvedensky believed it possible to prove the impossibility of metaphysical knowledge and, as a corollary so to speak, that everything we know, including our own self, is merely an appearance, not a thing in itself. Vvedensky was also willing to cede that the time and the space in which we experience everything in the world are also phenomenal. Although metaphysical knowledge is impossible, metaphysical hypotheses, being likewise irrefutable, can be brought into a world-view based on faith. Particularly useful are those demanded by our moral tenets such as the existence of other minds.

The next two decades saw a blossoming of academic philosophy on a scale hardly imaginable just a short time earlier. Most fashionable Western philosophies of the time found adherents within the increasingly professional Russian scene. Even Friedrich Nietzsche's thought began to make inroads, particularly among certain segments of the artistic community and among the growing number of political radicals. Nonetheless, few, particularly during these formative years, adopted any Western system without significant qualifications. Even those who were most receptive to foreign ideas adapted them in line with traditional Russian concerns, interests, and attitudes. One of these traditional concerns was with Platonism in general. Some of Plato's dialogues appeared in a Masonic journal as early as 1777, and we can easily discern an interest in Plato's ideas as far back as the medieval period. Possibly the Catholic assimilation of Aristotelianism had something to do with the Russian Orthodox Church's emphasis on Plato. And again possibly this interest in Plato had something to do with the metaphysical and idealistic character of much classic Russian thought as against the decidedly more empirical character of many Western philosophies. We have already noted the Christian Platonism of Jurkevich, and his student Solovyov, who with his central concept of "vseedinstvo" ("total-unity") can, in turn, also be seen as a modern neo-Platonist.

In the immediate decades preceding the Bolshevik Revolution of 1917, a veritable legion of philosophers worked in Solovyov's wide shadow. Among the most prominent of these was S. Trubetskoi (1862-1905). The Platonic strain of his thought is evident in the very topics Trubetskoi chose for his magister's and doctoral theses: Metaphysics in Ancient Greece, 1890 and The History of the Doctrine of Logos, 1900, respectively. It is, however, in his programmatic essays "O prirode chelovecheskovo soznanija" ("The Nature of Human Consciousness"), 1889-1891 and "Osnovanija idealizma" ("The Foundations of Idealism"), 1896 that Trubetskoi elaborated his position with regard to modern philosophy. Holding that the basic problem of contemporary philosophy is whether human knowledge is of a personal nature, Trubetskoi maintained that modern Western philosophers relate personal knowledge to a personal consciousness. Herein lies their error. Human consciousness is not an individual consciousness, but, rather, an on-going universal process. Likewise, this process is a manifestation not of a personal mind but of a cosmic one. Personal consciousness, as he puts it, presupposes a collective consciousness, and the latter presupposes an absolute consciousness. Kant's great error was in conceiving the transcendental consciousness as subjective. In the second of the essays mentioned above, Trubetskoi claims that there are three means of knowing reality: empirically through the senses, rationally through thought, and directly through faith. For him, faith is what convinces us that there is an external world, a world independent of my subjective consciousness. It is faith that underlies our accepting the information provided by our sense organs as reliable. Moreover, it is faith that leads me to think there are in the world other beings with a mental organization and capacity similar to mine. However, Trubetskoi rejects equating his notion of faith with the passive "intellectual intuition" of Schelling and Solovyov. For Trubetskoi, faith is intimately connected with the will, which is the basis of my individuality. My discovery of the other is grounded in my desire to reach out beyond myself, that is, to love.

Although generally characterized as a neo-Leibnizian, N. Lossky (1870-1965) was also greatly influenced by a host of Russian thinkers including Solovyov and Kozlov. In addition to his own views, Lossky, having studied at Bern and Goettingen among other places, is remembered for his pioneering studies of contemporary German philosophy. He referred to Edmund Husserl's Logical Investigations already as early as 1906, and in 1911 he gave a course on Husserl's "intentionalism." Despite this early interest in strict epistemological problems, Lossky in general drew ever closer to the ontological concerns and positions of Russian Orthodoxy. He termed his epistemological views "intuitivism," believing that the cognitive subject apprehends the external world as it is in itself directly. Nevertheless, the object of cognition remains ontologically transcendent, while epistemologically immanent. This direct penetration into reality is possible, Lossky tells us, because all worldly entities are interconnected into an "organic whole." Additionally, all sensory properties of an object (for example, its color, texture, temperature, and so on) are actual properties of the object, our sense stimulation serving merely to direct our mental attention to those properties. That different people see one object in different ways is explained as a result of different ways individuals have of getting their attention directly towards one of the object's numerous properties. All entities, events, and relations that lack a temporal and spatial character possess "ideal being" and are the objects of "intellectual intuition." Yet, there is another, a third, realm of being that transcends the laws of logic (here we see the influence of Lossky's teacher, Vvedensky), which he calls "metalogical being" and is the object of mystical intuition.

Another kindred spirit was S. Frank (1877-1950), who in his early adult years was involved with Marxism and political activities. His magister's thesis Predmet znanija (The Object of Knowledge), 1915, is notable as much for its masterful handling of current Western philosophy as for its overall metaphysical position. Demonstrating a grasp not only of German neo-Kantianism, Frank drew freely from, among many others, Husserl, Henri-Louis Bergson, and Max Scheler; he may even have been the first in Russian to refer to Gottlob Frege, whose Foundations of Arithmetic Frank calls "one of the rare genuinely philosophical works by a mathematician." Frank contends that all logically determined objects are possible thanks to a metalogical unity, which is itself not subject to the laws of logic. Likewise, all logical knowledge is possible thanks solely to an "intuition," an "integral intuition," of this unity. Such intuition is possible because all of us are part of this unity or Absolute. In a subsequent book Nepostizhimoe (The Unknowable), 1939, Frank further elaborated his view stating that mystical experience reveals the supra-logical sphere in which we are immersed but which cannot be conceptually described. Although there is a great deal more to Frank's thought, we see that we are quickly leaving behind the secular, philosophical sphere for the religious, if not mystical.

No survey, however brief, of Russian thinkers under Solovyov's influence would be satisfactory without mention of the best known of these in the West, namely N. Berdjaev (1874-1948). Widely hailed as a Christian existentialist, he began his intellectual journey as a Marxist. However, by the time of his first publications he was attempting to unite a revolutionary political outlook with transcendental idealism, particularly a Kantian ethic. Within the next few years, Berdjaev's thought evolved quickly and decisively away from Marxism and away from critical idealism to an outright Orthodox Christian idealism. On the issue of free will versus determinism, Berdjaev moved from an initial acceptance of soft determinism to a resolute incompatibilist. Morality, he claimed, demanded his stand. Certainly, Berdjaev was among the first, if not the first, philosopher of his era to diminish the importance of epistemology in place of ontology. In time, however, he himself made clear that the pivot of his thought was not the concept of Being, as it would be for some others, and even less that of knowledge, but, rather, the concept of freedom. Acknowledging his debt to Kant, Berdjaev too saw science as providing knowledge of phenomenal reality but not of actuality, of things as they are in themselves. However applicable the categories of logic and physics may be to appearances, they are assuredly inapplicable to the noumenal world and, in particular, to God. In this way Berdjaev does not object to the neo-Kantianism of Vvedensky, for whom the objectification of the world is a result of functioning of the human cognitive apparatus, but only that it does not go far enough. There is another world or realm, namely one characterized by freedom.

Just as all of the above figures drew inspiration from Christian neo-Platonism, so too did they all feel the need to address the Kantian heritage. Lossky's dissertation Obosnovanie intuitivizma (The Foundations of Intuitivism), for example, is an extended engagement with Kant's epistemology, Lossky himself having prepared a Russian translation of Kant's Critique of Pure Reason comparable in style and adequacy to Norman Kemp Smith's famous rendering into English. Trubetskoi called Kant the "Copernicus of modern philosophy," who "discovered that there is an a priori precondition of all possible experience." Nevertheless, among the philosophers of this era, not all saw transcendental idealism as a springboard to religious and mystical thought. A student of Vvedensky's, I. Lapshin (1870-1952) in his dissertation, Zakony myshlenija i formy poznanija (The Laws of Thought and the Forms of Cognition), 1906, attempted to show that, contrary to Kant's stand, space and time were categories of cognition and that all thought, even logical, relies on a categorical synthesis. Consequently, the laws of logic are themselves synthetic, not analytic, as Kant had thought and are applicable only within the bounds of possible experience.

G. Chelpanov (1863-1936), who taught at Moscow University, was another with a broadly conceived Kantian stripe. Remembered as much, if not more so, for his work in experimental psychology as in philosophy, Chelpanov, unlike many others, wished to retain the concept of the thing-in-itself, seeing it as that which ultimately "evokes" a particular representation of an object. Without it, contended Chelpanov, we are left (as in Kant) without an explanation of why we perceive this, and not that, particular object. In much the same manner, we must appeal to some transcendent space in order to account for why we see an object in this spot and not another. For these reasons, Chelpanov called his position "critical realism" as opposed to the more usual construal of Kantianism as "transcendental idealism." In psychology, Chelpanov upheld the psychophysical parallelism of Wilhelm Wundt.

As the years of the First World War approached, a new generation of scholars came to the fore who returned to Russia from graduate work in Germany broadly sympathetic to one or even an amalgam of the schools of neo-Kantianism. Among these young scholars, the works of B. Kistjakovsky (1868-1920) and P. Novgorodtsev (1866-1924) stand out as arguably the most accessible today for their analytic approach to questions of social-science methodology.

During this period, Husserlian phenomenology was introduced into Russia from a number of sources, but its first and, in a sense, only major propagandist was G. Shpet (1879-1937), whom we have referred to earlier. In any case, besides his historical studies Shpet did pioneering work in hermeneutics as early as 1918. Additionally, in two memorable essays he respectively argued, along the lines of the early Husserl and the late Solovyov, against the Husserlian view of the transcendental ego and in the other traced the Husserlian notion of philosophy as a rigorous science back to Parmenides.

Regrettably, Shpet was permanently silenced during the Stalinist era, but A. Losev (1893-1988), whose early works fruitfully employed some early phenomenological techniques, survived and blossomed in its aftermath. Concentrating on ancient Greek thought, particularly aesthetics, his numerous publications have yet to be assimilated into world literature, although during later years his enormous contributions were recognized within his homeland and by others to whom they were linguistically accessible. It must be said, nonetheless, that Losev's personal pronouncements hark back to a neo-Platonism completely at odds with the modern temperament.

d. The Soviet Era (1917-1991)

The Bolshevik Revolution of 1917 ushered in a political regime with a set ideology that countenanced no intellectual competition. During the first few years of its existence, Bolshevik attention was directed towards consolidating political power, and the selection of university personnel in many cases was left an internal matter. In 1922, however, most explicitly non-Marxist philosophers who had not already fled were banished from the country. Many of them found employment, at least for a time, in the major cities of Europe and continued their personal intellectual agendas. None of them, however, during their lifetimes significantly influenced philosophical developments either in their homeland or in the West, and few, with the notable exception of Berdyaev, received wide recognition.

During the first decade of Bolshevik rule, the consuming philosophical question concerned the role of Marxism with regard to traditional academic disciplines, particularly those that had either emerged since Karl Marx's death or had seen recent breathtaking developments that had reshaped the field. The best known dispute occurred between the "mechanists" and the "dialecticians" or "Deborinists," after its principal advocate A. Deborin (1881-1963). Since a number of individuals composed both groups and the issues in dispute evolved over time, no simple statement of the respective stances can do complete justice to either. Nevertheless, the mechanists essentially held that philosophy as a separate discipline had no reason for being within the Soviet state. All philosophical problems could and would be resolved by the natural sciences. The hallowed dialectical method of Marxism was, in fact, just the scientific method. The Deborinists, on the other hand, defended the existence of philosophy as a separate discipline. Indeed, they viewed the natural sciences as built on a set of philosophical principles. Unlike the mechanists, they saw nature as fundamentally dialectical, which could not be reduced to simpler mechanical terms. Even human history and society proceeded dialectically in taking leaps that resulted in qualitatively different states. The specifics of the controversy, which raged until 1929, are of marginal philosophical importance now, but to some degree the basic issue of the relation of philosophy to the sciences, of the role of the former with regard to the latter, endures to this day. Regrettably, politics played as much of a role in the course of the dispute as abstract reasoning, and the outcome was a simple matter of a political fiat with the Deborinists gaining a temporary victory. Subsequent events over the next two decades, such as the defeat of the Deborinists, have nothing to do with philosophy. What philosophy did continue to be pursued during these years within Russia was kept a personal secret, any disclosure of which was at the expense of one's life. To a certain degree, the issue of the role of philosophy arose again in the 1950s when the philosophical implications of relativity theory became a disputed subject. Again, the issue arose of whether philosophy or science had priority. This time, however, with atomic weapons securely in hand there could be no doubt as to the ultimate victor with little need for political intervention.

Another controversy, though less vociferous, concerned psychological methodology and the very retention of such common terms as "consciousness," "psyche," and "attention." The introspective method, as we saw advocated by many of the idealistic philosophers, was seen by the new ideologues as subjective and unscientific in that it manifestly referred to private phenomena. I. Pavlov (1849-1936), already a star of Russian science at the time of the Revolution, was quickly seen as utilizing a method that subjected psychic activity to the objective methods of the natural sciences. The issue became, however, whether the use of objective methods would eliminate the need to invoke such traditional terms as "consciousness." The central figure here was V. Bekhterev (1857-1927), who believed that since all mental processes eventually manifested themselves in objectively observable behavior, subjective terminology was superfluous. Again, the discussion was silenced through political means once a victory was secured over the introspectionists. Bekhterev's behaviorism was itself found to be dangerously leftist.

As noted above, during the 1930s and '40s, independent philosophizing virtually ceased to exist, and what little was published is of no more than historical interest. Indicative of the condition of Russian thought at this time is the fact that when in 1946 the government decided to introduce logic into the curriculum of secondary schools the only suitable text available was a slim book by Chelpanov dating from before the Revolution. After Joseph Stalin's death, a relative relaxation or "thaw" in the harsh intellectual climate was permitted, of course within the strict bounds of the official state ideology. In addition to the re-surfacing of the old issue of the role of Marxism with respect to the natural sciences, Russian scholars sought a return to the traditional texts in hopes of understanding the original inspiration of the official philosophy. Some, such as the young A. Zinoviev (1922-2006) sought an understanding of "dialectical logic" in terms of the operations, procedures and techniques employed in political economics. Others, for example, V. Tugarinov, drew heavily on Hegel's example in attempting to delineate a system of fundamental categories.

After the formal recognition in the validity of formal logic, it received significant attention in the ensuing years by Zinoviev, D. Gorsky, and E. Voishvillo, among many others. Their works have deservedly received international attention and made no use of the official ideology. What sense, if any, to make of "dialectical logic" was another matter that could not remain politically neutral. Until the last days of the Soviet period, there was no consensus as to what it is or its relation to formal logic. One of the most resolute defenders of dialectical logic was E. Ilyenkov, who has received attention even in the West. In epistemology too, surface agreement, demonstrated through use of an official vocabulary obscured (but did not quite hide) differences of opinion concerning precisely how to construe the official stand. It certainly now appears that little of enduring worth in this field was published during the Soviet years. However, some philosophers who were active at that time produced works that only recently have been published. Perhaps the most striking example is M. Mamardashvili (1930-1990), who during his lifetime was noted for his deep interest in the history of philosophy and his anti-Hegelian stands.

Most work in ethics in the Soviet period took a crude apologetic form of service to the state. In essence, the good is that which promotes the stated goals of Soviet society. Against such a backdrop, Ja. Mil'ner-Irinin's study Etika ili printsy istinnoj chelovechnosti (Ethics or The Principles of a True Humanity) is all the more remarkable. Although only an excerpt appeared in print in the 1960s, the book-length manuscript, which as a whole was rejected for publication, was circulated and discussed. The author presented a normative system that he held to be universally valid and timeless. Harking back to the early days of German Idealism, Mil'ner-Irinin urged being true to one's conscience as a moral principle. However, he claimed he deduced his deontology from human social nature rather than from the idea of rationality (as in Kant).

After the accession of L. Brezhnev to the position of General Secretary and particularly after the events that curtailed the Prague Spring in 1968, all signs of independent philosophizing beat a speedy retreat. The government anxiously launched a campaign for ideological vigilance, which a German scholar, H. Dahm, termed an "ideological counter-reformation," that persisted until the "perestroika" of the Gorbachev years.

e. The Post-Soviet Era (1991-)

Clearly, the dissolution of the Soviet Union and the relegation of the Communist Party to the political opposition has also ushered in a new era in the history of Russian philosophy. What trends will emerge is still too early to tell. How Russian philosophers will eventually evaluate their own recent, as well as tsarist, past may turn to a large degree on the country's political and economic fortunes. Not surprisingly, the 1990s saw, in particular, a "re-discovery" of the previously forbidden works of the religious philosophers active just prior to or at the time of the Bolshevik Revolution. Whether Russian philosophers will continue along these lines or approach a style resembling Western "analytical" trends remains an open question.

3. Concluding Remarks

In the above historical survey we have emphasized Russian epistemological over ontological and ethical concerns, hopefully without neglecting or disparaging them. Admittedly, doing so may reflect a certain "Western bias." Nevertheless, such a survey, whatever its deficiencies, shows that questions regarding the possibility of knowledge have never been completely foreign to the Russian mind. This we can unequivocally state without dismissing Masaryk's position, for indeed during the immediate decades preceding the 1917 Revolution epistemology was not accorded special attention, let alone priority. Certainly at the time when Masaryk formulated his position, Russian philosophy was relatively young. Nonetheless, were the non-critical features of Russian philosophy, which Masaryk so correctly observed, a reflection of the Russian mind as such or were they a reflection of the era observed? If one were to view 19th century German philosophy from the rise of Hegelianism to the emergence of neo-Kantianism, would one not see it as shortchanging epistemology? Could it not be that our error lay in focussing on a single period in Russian history, albeit the philosophically most fruitful one? In any case, the mere existence of divergent opinions during the Soviet era—however cautiously these had to be expressed—on recurring fundamental questions testifies to the tenacity of philosophy on the human mind.

Rather than ask for the general characteristics of Russian philosophy, should we not ask why philosophy arose so late in Russia compared to other nations? Was Vvedensky correct that the country lacked suitable educational institutions until relatively recently, or was he writing as a university professor who saw no viable alternative to make a living? Could it be that Shpet was right in thinking that no one found any utilitarian value in philosophy except in modest service to theology, or was he merely expressing his own fears for the future of philosophy in an overtly ideological state? Did Masaryk have grounds for linking the late emergence of philosophy in Russia to the perceived anti-intellectualism of Orthodox theology, or was he simply speaking as a Unitarian. Finally, intriguing as this question may be, are we not in searching for an answer guilty of what some would label the mistake of reductionism, that is, of trying to resolve a philosophical problem by appeal to non-philosophical means?

4. References and Further Reading

Secondary works in Western languages:

  • Copleston, Frederick C. Philosophy in Russia, From Herzen to Lenin and Berdyaev, Notre Dame, 1986.
  • Dahm, Helmut. Der gescheiterte Ausbruch: Entideologisierung und ideologische Gegenreformation in Osteuropa (1960-1980), Baden-Baden, 1982.
  • DeGeorge, Richard T. Patterns of Soviet Thought, Ann Arbor, 1966.
  • Goerdt, W. Russische Philosophie: Zugaenge und Durchblicke, Freiburg/Muenchen, 1984.
  • Joravsky, David. Soviet Marxism and Natural Science 1917-1932, NY, 1960.
  • Koyre, Alexandre. La philosophie et le probleme national en Russie au debut du XIXe siecle, Paris, 1929.
  • Lossky, Nicholas O. History of Russian Philosophy, New York, 1972.
  • Masaryk, Thomas Garrigue. The Spirit of Russia, trans. Eden & Cedar Paul, NY, 1955.
  • Scanlan, James P. Marxism in the USSR, A Critical Survey of Current Soviet Thought, Ithaca, 1985
  • Walicki, Andrzej. A History of Russian Thought from the Enlightenment to Marxism, Stanford, 1979.
  • Zenkovsky, V. V. A History of Russian Philosophy, trans. George L. Kline, London, 1967.

Author Information

Thomas Nemeth
U. S. A.

Nikolai Fedorovich Fedorov (1829—1903)

FedorovFedorov's thoughts have been variously described as bold, culminating, curious, easily-misunderstood, extreme, hazy, idealist, naive, of-value, scientifico-magical, special, unexpected, unique, and utopian. Many of the small number of philosophers familiar with Fedorov admit his originality, his independence, his human concern, perhaps even his logic -- up to a point. But his resurrection project is viewed with understandable skepticism and often dismissed as an impossible fantasy. Interestingly, the harshest criticism has come from Christian thinkers such as Florovsky and Ustryalov whose objections bear religious overtones; some materialists such as Muravyov and Setnitsky have been quite benign and favorable by comparison. Perhaps all would agree, however, on Fedorov's single-mindedness. Looked at positively, this is simply another term for purity-of-heart, a quality of saintliness. With his strong emphasis on kinship and brotherhood demanding, ultimately, a world in which all must mutually benefit, Fedorov perhaps anticipates Rawls who says: "Thus what we are doing is to combine into one conception the totality of conditions that we are ready upon due reflection to recognize as reasonable in our conduct with regard to one another. ... all persons ... even ... persons who are not contemporaries but who belong to many generations. Thus to see our place in society from the perspective of this position is ... to regard the human situation not only from all social but also from all temporal points of view. The perspective of eternity is not a perspective from a certain place beyond the world, nor the point of view of a transcendent being; rather it is a certain form of thought and feeling that rational persons can adopt within the world. ... Purity of heart, if one could attain it, would be to see clearly and to act with grace and self-command from this point of view." Fedorov wrote: "By refusing to grant ourselves the right to set ourselves apart ... we are kept from setting any goal for ourselves that is not the common task of all." But Fedorov's thought soars beyond the present world to a world of its own, in his insistence that we can become immortal and godlike through rational efforts, and that our moral obligation is to create a heaven to be shared by all who ever lived.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Philosophy
  3. Further Reading

1. Life

Russian philosopher, teacher, and librarian Nikolai Fedorovich Fedorov was born June 9, 1829, and died December 28, 1903. He was founder of an immortalist (anti-death) philosophy emphasizing "the common task" of resurrecting the dead through scientific means. Since the end of the Cold War, his thought has received renewed interest and advocacy in Russia and elsewhere -- for example, in connection with cryonics (cryonic hibernation) and prolongevity. Nikolai Fedorovich Fedorov (alternative romanized spellings are possible -- for example: Nicholas Fyodorovich Fyodorov) advocated the ethical priority of a research and development project he called "the common task," by which he meant the universal physical resurrection of the dead by future advances in science and technology. He was highly praised by such people as Fyodor Dostoevsky and Leo Tolstoy (literature), Afanasi Fet (poetry), and Konstantin Tsiolkowsky (astronautics), yet he is not well known in the West, despite some limited interest. The illegitimate son of Prince Pavel Ivanovich Gagarin and Elisaveta Ivanova, a woman of lower-class nobility, Nikolai (with his mother and her other children) had to leave his father's home at age four, due to the prince's death. The family continued to be well cared for, however. Beginning in 1868, he worked for 25 years as a librarian with the Rumiantsev Museum (now the Russian State Library), Moscow; during this period, he was teacher-mentor of the young Konstantin Tsiolkowsky. After retiring, and until his death, he worked in the Archives of the Ministry of Foreign Affairs. His works, published posthumously, were available (in accordance with the Christian spirit of Fedorov's philosophy) only free of charge from the publisher, who renounced all rights.

2. Philosophy

Due to his Christian perspective, Fedorov found the widespread lack of love among people appalling. He divided these non-loving relations into two kinds. One is alienation among people: "non-kindred relations of people among themselves." The other is isolation of the living from the dead: "nature's non-kindred relation to men." "[O]ne should live not for oneself nor for others but with all and for all" (Filosofiya Obshchago Dela vol. I, 118, n. 5, as quoted in Zakydalsky, 55). Fedorov is referring to all people of all time (past, present, future). He is speaking of a project to unite humankind, the colonization ("spiritualization") of the universe, the quest for the Kingdom of God, the creation of cosmos from chaos, the death of death, even resurrection of the dead. Fedorov believed, and passionately felt, that resignation in the face of death and separation of knowledge from action was false Christianity. He cautioned against being fooled into worshipping the blind forces of Satan. Rather, one should actively participate in changing what is into what ought to be.

The division between the learned and the unlearned was, in Fedorov's view, worse than the separation of the rich and the poor. The unlearned are more concerned with work than thought. The learned (philosophers and scientists) are less concerned with work than thought. The learned seem unaware that ideas "are not subjective, nor are they objective; they are projective." Philosophers and scientists, because they have separated ideas from moral action, are simply slaves to the imperfect present order. It is a root dogma of the learned that paradise is not possible. The unlearned should demand that the learned (because only they have the necessary knowledge) become a temporary task force for the Kingdom of God. The learned, however, will attempt to persuade us that problems like crop failures, disease, and death are not general questions but matters for a narrow discipline, questions for only a very small (or nonexistent) minority of the learned. Separation of the learned from the masses turns them into a seemingly permanent class, producing non-lovers of humankind. The "transformation of the blind course of nature into one that is rational ... is bound to appear to the learned as a disruption of order, although this order of theirs brings only disorder among men, striking them down with famine, plague, and death."

A citizen, a comrade, or a team-member can be replaced by another. However a person loved, one's kin, is irreplaceable. Moreover, memory of one's dead kin is not the same as the real person. Pride in one's forefathers is a vice, a form of egotism. On the other hand, love of one's forefathers means sadness in their death, requiring the literal raising of the dead. Politics must be replaced by physics. The politics of egoism and altruism must be replaced by Christianity which "knows only all men." Pride is a Tower of Babel that separates us from one another. Love is a "fusion as opposed to a confusion." For Fedorov, "complete and universal salvation" is preferable to "incomplete or non-universal salvation in which some men -- the sinners -- are condemned to eternal torments and others -- the righteous -- to an eternal contemplation of these torments." That is to say, Fedorov's bold science project, "the common task," is not the only possible route to salvation. "Salvation may also occur without the participation of men ... if they do not unite in the common task"; "if we do not unite to accomplish our salvation, if we do not accept the Gospel message," then a "purely transcendent resurrection will save only the elect; for the rest it will be an expression of God's wrath," "eternal punishment." "I believe this literally." "Christianity has not fully saved the world, because it has not been fully assimilated." Christianity "is not simply a doctrine of redemption, but the very task of redemption."

Fedorov's thoughts have been variously described as bold, culminating, curious, easily-misunderstood, extreme, hazy, idealist, naive, of-value, scientifico-magical, special, unexpected, unique, and utopian. Many of the small number of philosophers familiar with Fedorov admit his originality, his independence, his human concern, perhaps even his logic -- up to a point. But his resurrection project is viewed with understandable skepticism and often dismissed as an impossible fantasy. Interestingly, the harshest criticism has come from Christian thinkers such as Florovsky and Ustryalov whose objections bear religious overtones; some materialists such as Muravyov and Setnitsky have been quite benign and favorable by comparison. Perhaps all would agree, however, on Fedorov's single-mindedness. Looked at positively, this is simply another term for purity-of-heart, a quality of saintliness. With his strong emphasis on kinship and brotherhood demanding, ultimately, a world in which all must mutually benefit, Fedorov perhaps anticipates Rawls who says: "Thus what we are doing is to combine into one conception the totality of conditions that we are ready upon due reflection to recognize as reasonable in our conduct with regard to one another. ... all persons ... even ... persons who are not contemporaries but who belong to many generations. Thus to see our place in society from the perspective of this position is ... to regard the human situation not only from all social but also from all temporal points of view. The perspective of eternity is not a perspective from a certain place beyond the world, nor the point of view of a transcendent being; rather it is a certain form of thought and feeling that rational persons can adopt within the world. ... Purity of heart, if one could attain it, would be to see clearly and to act with grace and self-command from this point of view." Fedorov wrote: "By refusing to grant ourselves the right to set ourselves apart ... we are kept from setting any goal for ourselves that is not the common task of all." But Fedorov's thought soars beyond the present world to a world of its own, in his insistence that we can become immortal and godlike through rational efforts, and that our moral obligation is to create a heaven to be shared by all who ever lived. "[D]eath is merely the result or manifestation of our infantilism, lack of independence and self-reliance, and of our incapacity for mutual support and the restoration of life. People are still minors, half-beings, whereas the fullness of personal existence, personal perfection, is possible. However, it is possible only within general perfection. Coming of age will bring perfect health and immortality, but for the living [living contemporaries of Fedorov] immortality is impossible without the resurrection of the dead"(What Was Man Created For?, 76).

3. Further Reading

(Collected Works in Russian)

  • Fedorov, N. F. Filosofiya Obshchago Dela: Stat'i, Mysli, i Pis'ma Nikolaia Fedorovicha Fedorova, ed. V. A. Kozhevnikov and N. P. Peterson, 2 vols. originally published by Fedorov's friends and followers after his death, 1906, 1913; reprint London: Gregg Press, 1970.
  • Fedorov, N. F. Sobranie Sochineniy, 4 vols. + supp. Moscow: Traditsiya, 2000.

(Works in English)

  • Berdyaev, N. A. "N. F. Fyodorov." The Russian Review 9 (1950) 124-130.
    • Fedorov's thought was not without influence on Berdyaev's existentialism.
  • Berdyaev, N. A. The Russian Idea. New York: Macmillan Co., 1948.
    • Fedorov and other original Russian thinkers are discussed.
  • Fedorov, N. F. "The Question of Brotherhood or Kinship, of the Reasons for the Unbrotherly, Unkindred, or Unpeaceful State of the World, and of the Means for the Restoration of Kinship" in Edie, J. M.; Scanlan, J. P.; Zeldin, M.; and Kline, G. L., eds. Russian Philosophy. Chicago: Quadrangle Books, 1965. 16-54.
    • This is one place to begin if you want to read Fedorov directly (in English translation).
  • Fedorov, N. F. What Was Man Created For? The Philosophy of the Common Task: Selected Works. Koutiassov, E.; and Minto, M., eds. Lausanne, Switzerland: Honeyglen/L'Age d'Homme, 1990.
    • A good source of Fedorov in English translation; includes a list of Russian language works in the bibliography.
  • Lossky, N. O. History of Russian Philosophy. New York: International Universities Press, 1951.
    • Fedorov is included in this history.
  • Lukashevich, S. N. F. Fedorov (1828-1903): A Study in Russian Eupsychian and Utopian Thought. Newark: University of Delaware Press, 1977.
    • The methodology used in this study may not insure full appreciation of Fedorov's thought, but it does demonstrate that his thought was indeed a detailed, coherent philosophy in which the various pieces fit together.
  • Schmemann, A., ed. Ultimate Questions: An Anthology of Modern Russian Religious Thought. New York: Holt, Rinehart and Winston, 1965; reprint Crestwood, NY: St. Vladimir's Seminary Press, 1977.
    • Selections (translations) from Russian religious thinkers, including Fedorov, concerned with eschatology or other "ultimate" questions. The Fedorov material is from vol. 1 of Filosofiya Obshchago Dela and deals with "the restoration of kinship among mankind."
  • Soloviov, M. "The 'Russian Trace' in the History of Cryonics," Cryonics 16:4 (4th Quarter, 1995) 20-23.
    • Closing paragraph describes author's then-current (post-cold-war) and perhaps unprecedented efforts promoting cryonics and immortalism in the former Soviet Union; the article itself acknowledges a debt to Fedorov.
  • Young, G. M. Nikolai F. Fedorov: An Introduction. Belmont, Mass.: Nordland Publishing Co., 1979.
    • Not only an excellent introduction, but a mine of references and information inviting further Fedorovian research, including Russian language works, many of which are not yet translated (or not fully translated) into English.
  • Zakydalsky, T. D. N. F. Fyodorov's Philosophy of Physical Resurrection. Ann Arbor, Mich.: UMI, 1976.
    • A Ph.D. dissertation (Bryn Mawr) of 531 pages. Bibliography has a list of Russian language works.
  • Zenkovsky, V. V. A History of Russian Philosophy. New York: Columbia University Press, 1953.
    • Fedorov is included in this history.

Author Information

Charles Tandy
Ria University
U. S. A.

R. Michael Perry
U. S. A.

Aztec Philosophy

aztecConquest-era Aztecs conceived philosophy in essentially pragmatic terms. The raison d'etre of philosophical inquiry was to provide humans with practicable answers to what Aztecs identified as the defining question of human existence: How can we maintain our balance while walking upon the slippery earth? Aztec philosophers addressed this question against an assumed metaphysics which held that the cosmos and its human inhabitants are constituted by and ultimately identical with a single, vivifying, eternally self-generating and self-regenerating sacred energy. Knowledge, truth, value, rightness, and beauty were defined in terms of the aim of humans maintaining their balance as well as the balance of the cosmos. Every moment and aspect of human life was meant to further the realization of this aim.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
    1. Who were the Aztecs?
    2. Sources for Studying Nahua Thought
    3. The Approach of This Study
  2. Nahua Metaphysics
    1. Teotl as Ultimate Reality and Root Metaphor
    2. Dialectical Polar Monism
    3. Pantheism
    4. Teotl as Self-Transforming Shaman and Artist
    5. Teotl as Root Metaphor
    6. Popular Aztec Religion
    7. Living in the "House of Paintings"
    8. Time-Space
  3. The Defining Problematic of Nahua Philosophy
    1. How Can Humans Maintain their Balance on the Slippery Earth?
    2. The Character of Wisdom
  4. Epistemology
    1. The Raison d'etre of Epistemology
    2. Truth as Well-Rootedness and Alethia
    3. Cognitive Burgeoning and Flowering
    4. "Flower and Song"
  5. Intrinsic Value: Balance and Purity
  6. Morality: Living in Balance and Purity
  7. Aesthetics
  8. Conclusion
  9. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

a. Who were the Aztecs?

The indigenous peoples of Mesoamerica enjoy a long and rich tradition of philosophical speculation. The Aztecs and other Nahuatl-speaking peoples of the High Central Plateau of Mexico were no exception. Nahuatl-speaking peoples originated in northern Mexico and southwestern United States, migrating south in successive waves to the central Mexican highlands during the thirteenth and fourteenth centuries. Nahuatl is a member of the Uto-Aztecan linguistic family and related to Ute, Hopi, and Comanche. Nahuatl-speakers included among others the Mexicas (known to us but not to themselves as "Aztecs"), Texcocans, Chalcans, and Tlaxcaltecs. Due to their common language and culture, scholars standardly refer to Nahuatl-speakers as "Nahuas", and to their culture, as "Nahua culture". I follow this practice here. Nahua culture flourished in the fifteenth- and sixteenth- centuries prior to 1521 (CE), the fall of the Aztec capital, Tenochtitlan, and official date of the Conquest.

b. Sources for Studying Nahua Philosophy

Our sources for studying Conquest-era Nahua philosophy include: (1) native pictorial histories, ritual almanacs, tribute records, and maps, including the Codex Mendoza (painted several years after the Conquest), Codex Borgia (painted shortly before the Conquest), and Codex Borbonicus (painted about the time of the Conquest); (2) reports of the Spanish conquerors (e.g. Hernando Cortes and Bernal Diaz del Costillo); (3) ethnography-style works composed by missionaries (e.g. Friars Olmos, Motolinia, Sahagun, Duran and Mendieta) entering Mexico shortly after the Conquest -- most notably Sahagun's encyclopedic Historia General de las Cosas de Nueva Espana; (4) early seventeenth-century chronicles of Fernando de Alva Ixtlilxochitl and Domingo de San Anton Munon Chimalpahin Quauhtlehuanitzin, both Spanish-educated creole descendants of Aztec nobility; (5) native sources of non-Nahuatl-speaking indigenous peoples of Mexico (e.g. the Dresden Codex and Popol Vuh; (6) ethnographies of contemporary Nahuatl-speaking (e.g. Knab 1995; Sandstrom 1991) and non-Nahuatl-speaking (e.g. Hunt 1977; Monaghan 1995; Myerhoff 1974; Schaefer 2002; Tedlock 1992) indigenous peoples; and (6) archaeological studies (e.g. Smith 1996). (For further discussion see Carmack, et al. 1996; Leon-Portilla 1963).

c. The Approach of This Study

I approach Conquest-era Nahua philosophy by hermeneutical triangulation using the above sources. I assume Nahua philosophy to be a coherent body of thought consisting tentatively of four interrelated divisions: metaphysics, epistemology, theory of value, and aesthetics. In hermeneutical fashion, understanding Nahua philosophy as a whole depends upon understanding each division, while understanding each division depends upon understanding the other divisions as well as the whole.

Approaching Nahua philosophy in these terms is not without hazard. Although mainstays in European philosophy, they demarcate categories for which there are no precise, noncontroversial synonyms in Nahuatl. Nahua tlamatinime ("knowers of things," "sages," "philosophers;" tlamatini [singular]) do not appear to have analyzed philosophical thought in these terms. Rather, they conceived metaphysics, epistemology, theory of value, and aesthetics in conceptually overlapping if not equivalent terms.

Why then employ them? I believe doing so offers Western readers an intuitive first step into Nahua philosophy since they are deeply entrenched in Western thought. What's more, they are commonly employed in Nahua scholarship (e.g. Burkhart 1989; Gingerich 1987, 1988; Leon-Portilla 1963; Lopez Austin 1988, 1997; Read 1998). Their heuristic utility notwithstanding, employing them must not mislead us into thinking that Nahua philosophers conceived philosophy in precisely these terms. Successfully understanding Nahua philosophy requires in the final analysis that we reconceive these divisions as a single, seamless conceptual whole. (For discussion of the pitfalls involved in using Western concepts to understand non-Western thought, see Asad 1986; Hall and Ames 1995; Maffie 2004; Wiredu 1996.)

I attribute the following views to the Nahuas generally, although it is more accurate to attribute them to the upper elite of priests, scholars, and educated nobility. Afterall, views differed between: priests, merchants, and farmers; men and women; dominant and subordinate city-states; and various regional and ethnic subgroups. I attribute the views to the period of the Mesoamerican-European contact, realizing full well that philosophies are living works in progress.

2. Metaphysics

a. Teotl as Ultimate Reality and Root Metaphor

At the heart of Nahua philosophy stands the thesis that there exists a single, dynamic, vivifying, eternally self-generating and self-regenerating sacred power, energy or force: what the Nahuas called teotl (see Boone 1994; Burkhart 1989; Klor de Alva 1979; Monaghan 2000; H.B. Nicholson 1971; Read 1998; Townsend 1972). Elizabeth Boone (1994:105) writes, "The real meaning of [teotl] is spirit -- a concentration of power as a sacred and impersonal force". According to Jorge Klor de Alva (1979:7), "Teotl ...implies something more than the idea of the divine manifested in the form of a god or gods; instead it signifies the sacred in more general terms". The multiplicity of gods in official, state sanctioned Aztec religion does not gainsay this claim, for this multiplicity was merely the sacred, merely teotl, "separated, as it were by the prism of human sight, into its many attributes" (I. Nicholson 1959:63f).

Teotl continually generates and regenerates as well as permeates, encompasses, and shapes the cosmos as part of its endless process of self-generation-and--regeneration. That which humans commonly understand as nature -- e.g. heavens, earth, rain, humans, trees, rocks, animals, etc. -- is generated by teotl, from teotl as one aspect, facet, or moment of its endless process of self-generation-and-regeneration. Yet teotl is more than the unified totality of things; teotl is identical with everything and everything is identical with teotl. Since identical with teotl, they cosmos and its contents ultimately transcend such dichotomies as personal vs. impersonal, animate vs. inanimate, etc. As the single, all-encompassing life force of the universe, teotl vivifies the cosmos and its contents. Lastly, teotl is both metaphysically immanent and transcendent. It is immanent in that it penetrates deeply into every detail of the universe and exists within the myriad of created things; it is transcendent in that it is not exhausted by any single, existing thing.

Nahua metaphysics is processive. Process, movement, becoming and transmutation are essential attributes of teotl. Teotl is properly understood as ever-flowing and ever-changing energy-in-motion -- not as a discrete, static entity. Because doing so better reflects teotl's dynamic and processual nature, I suggest (following Cooper's [1997] proposal that we treat "God" of the mystical teachings of the Jewish Kabbalah as a verb) that we treat the word "teotl" as a verb denoting process and movement rather than as a noun denoting a discrete static entity. So construed, "teotl" refers to the eternal, universal process of teotlizing.

b. Dialectical Polar Monism

Although essentially processive and devoid of any permanent order, the ceaseless becoming of the cosmos is nevertheless characterized by an overarching balance, rhythm, and regularity: one provided by and constituted by teotl. Teotl's and hence the cosmos' ceaseless becoming is characterized by what I call "dialectical polar monism". Dialectical polar monism holds that: (1) the cosmos and its contents are substantively and formally identical with teotl; and (2) teotl presents itself primarily as the ceaseless, cyclical oscillation of polar yet complementary opposites.

Teotl's process presents itself in multiple aspects, preeminent among which is duality. This duality takes the form of the endless opposition of contrary yet mutually interdependent and mutually complementary polarities which divide, alternately dominate, and explain the diversity, movement, and momentary arrangement of the universe. These include: being and not-being, order and disorder, life and death, light and darkness, masculine and feminine, dry and wet, hot and cold, and active and passive. Life and death, for example, are mutually arising, interdependent, and complementary aspects of one and the same process. Life contains the seed of death; death, the fertile, energizing seed of life. The artists of Tlatilco and Oaxaca, for example, presented this duality artistically by fashioning a split-faced mask, one-half alive, one-half skull-like (see Markman and Markman 1989:90). The masks are intentionally ambiguous. Skulls simultaneously symbolize death and life, since life springs from the bones of the dead. Flesh simultaneously symbolizes life and death, since death arises from the flesh of the living. The faces are thus neither-alive-nor-dead-yet-both-alive-and-dead all at once.

The Nahuas' notion of duality contrasts with Zoroastrian-style eschatological dualisms. The latter claim: (1) order (goodness, life, light) and disorder (evil, death, darkness) are mutually exclusive forces; and (2) order (life, etc.) triumphs over disorder (death, etc.) at the end of history. Acording to Nahua duality, order and disorder, life and death, etc. alternate endlessly without resolution. It neither conceives death as inherently evil and life as inherently good nor advocates the conquest of death or the search for eternal life (see Caso 1958; Burkhart 1989; Carmack, et al. 1996; Hunt 1977; Knab 1995; Leon-Portilla 1963; Lopez Austin 1988, 1993, 1997; Monaghan 2000; Read 1998; Sandstrom 1991).

The created cosmos consists of the unending, cyclical tug-of-war or dialectical oscillation of these polarities -- all of which are the manifold manifestations of teotl. Because of this, the created cosmos is characterized as unstable, transitory, and devoid of any lasting being, order or structure. Yet teotl is nevertheless characterized by enduring pattern or regularity. How is this so? Teotl is the dynamic, sacred energy shaping as well as constituting these endless oscillations; it is the immanent balance of the endless, dialectical alternation of the created universe's interdependent polarities.

Because essentially processive and dynamic, teotl is properly characterized neither by being nor not-being but by becoming. Being and not-being are simply two dialectically interrelated presentations or facets of teotl, and as such inapplicable to teotl itself. Similarly, teotl is properly understood as neither ordered (law-governed) nor disordered (anarchic) but as unordered. Indeed, this point is fully general: life/death, active/passive, male/female, etc. are strictly speaking not predicable of teotl. Teotl captures a tertium quid transcending these dichotomies by being simultaneously neither-alive-nor-dead-yet-both-alive-and-dead, simultaneously neither-orderly-nor-disorderly-yet-both-orderly-and-disorderly, etc.

In the end, teotl is essentially an unstructured and unordered, seamless totality. Differentiation, regularity, order, etc. are simultaneously fictions of human unknowing and artistic-shamanic presentations of teotl. In Western philosophical terminology, one perhaps best characterizes the radical ontological indeterminacy of Nahua metaphysics as an extreme nominalist anti-realism, and teotl, as a Kantian-like noumenon.

c. Pantheism

Nahuas philosophers also conceived teotl pantheistically: (a) everything that exists constitutes an all-inclusive and interrelated unity; (b) this unity is sacred; (c) everything that exists is substantively identical and hence one with the sacred; (d) the sacred is teotl. There is only one thing, teotl, and all other forms or aspects of reality and existence are identical with teotl; (e) teotl is not a minded being or 'person' (in the Western sense of having intentional states or the capacity to make decisions). (See Levine 1994 for discussion of pantheism.)

Hunt (1977) and I. Nicholson (1959) offer closely similar interpretations of pre-Hispanic metaphysics. Eva Hunt writes:

...reality, nature and experience were nothing but multiple manifestations of a single unity of being... The [sacred] was both the one and the many... It was also multiple, fluid, encompassing of the whole, its aspects were changing images, dynamic, never frozen, but constantly recreated, redefined (Hunt 1977:55f.).

Alan Sandstrom's ethnography of contemporary Nahuatl-speakers in Veracruz, Mexico, offers a similar interpretation:

...everybody and everything is an aspect of a grand, single, overriding unity. Separate beings and objects do not exist--that is an illusion peculiar to human beings. In daily life we divide up our environment into discrete units so that we can talk about it and manipulate it for our benefit. But it is an error to assume that the diversity we create in our lives is the way reality is actually structured ... everything is connected at a deeper level, part of the same basic substratum of being... The universe is a deified, seamless totality (Sandstrom 1991:138).

d. Teotl as Self-Transforming Shaman and Artist

Teotl's ceaseless generating-and-regenerating of the cosmos is also one of ceaseless self-transformation-and-self-retransformation. The cosmos is teotl's self-transformation or self-transmutation -- not its creation ex nihilo. The Nahuas understood this process in two closely interrelated ways.

First, they conceived it artistically. Teotl is a sacred artist who endlessly fashions and refashions itself into and as the cosmos. The cosmos is teotl's in xochitl, in cuicatl ("flower-and-song"). The Nahuas used "in xochitl, in cuicatl" to refer specifically to the composing and performing of song-poems and to refer generally to creative, artistic, and metaphorical activity (e.g. singing poetry, music, painting/writing [the Nahuas regarded painting and writing as a single activity]). As teotl's "flower and song" the cosmos is teotl's grand, ongoing artistic-cum-metaphorical self-presentation; teotl's ongoing work of performance art or "metaphor in motion" (Markman and Markman 1989).

Second, they conceived teotl's self-transmutation in shamanic terms. The cosmos is teotl's nahual ("disguise" or "mask"). The Nahuatl word "nahual" derives from "nahualli" signifying a form-changing shaman (suggesting its indigenous shamanic roots). The continual becoming of the cosmos and its myriad aspects are teotl's shamanic self-masking and self-disguising (see P. Furst 1976; Gingerich 1988; H.B. Nicholson 1971; Ortiz de Montellano 1990).

Teotl artistically-cum-shamanically presents and masks itself to humans in a variety of ways: (1) the apparent thingness of existents, i.e. the appearance of static entities such as humans, mountains, trees, insects, etc. This is illusory, since one and all are merely facets of teotl's sacred motion; (2) the apparent multiplicity of existents, i.e. the appearance of discrete, independently existing entities such as individual humans, plants, mountains, etc. This is illusory since there is only one thing: teotl; and (3) the apparent exclusivity, independence, and irreconcilable oppositionality of dualities such as order and disorder, life and death, etc. This is illusory since they are interrelated, complementary facets of teotl.

As an epistemological consequence of teotl's self-disguising, when humans customarily gaze upon the world, what they see is teotl as a human, as a tree, as female, etc.--i.e. teotl self-disguised -- rather than teotl as teotl. As we shall see shortly below, wisdom enables humans to discern the sacred presence of teotl in its myriad disguises.

e. Teotl as Root Metaphor of Nahua Philosophy

Teotl functions as Stephen Pepper (1970) calls the "root metaphor" and what Alfredo Lopez Austin (1997) calls the "archetype" and "logical principle" governing the "unifying" "coherent nucleus" of Nahua philosophy. Teotl possesses metaphysical, epistemological, moral, and aesthetic facets in that it functions simultaneously as the source, object, and/or standard of reality, knowledge, value, rightness, and beauty.

f. Popular Aztec Religion

Many of the preceding claims were expressed mythologically and polytheistically in state-sanctioned, popular Aztec religion. Although the priests, nobility, and sages embraced its monistic aspect, the uneducated masses tended to embrace the polytheistic aspects of Nahua metaphysics (see Caso 1958; Leon-Portilla 1963:Ch II; H.B. Nicholson 1971:410-2; I. Nicholson 1959:60-3). State-sanctioned Aztec religion construed teotl as the supreme god, Ometeotl (literally, "Two God", also called in Tonan, in Tota, Huehueteotl, "our Mother, our Father, the Old God"), as well as a host of lesser gods, stars, fire, and water (Leon-Portilla 1963). Ometeotl was the god of duality, a male-female unity who resided in Omeyocan, "The place of duality", which occupied the highest levels of the heavens. S/he fathered/mothered her/himself as well as the universe. As "Lord and Lady of our flesh and sustenance", Ometeotl provided the universal cosmic energy from which all things derived their original as well as continued existence and sustenance; s/he provided and maintained the oscillating rhythm of the universe; and s/he gave all things their particular natures. In virtue of these attributes s/he was called the "one through whom all live" (Caso 1958:8) and the one "who is the very being of all things, preserving them and sustaining them" (Alonso de Molina, in Leon-Portilla 1963:92). Because metaphysically immanent, Ometeotl was called Tloque Nahuaque, the "one who is near to everything and to whom everything is near" (Angel Garibay, quoted in Leon-Portilla 1963:93). Because epistemologically transcendent (in the sense that humans are not guaranteed knowledge of Ometeotl), Ometeotl was called Yohualli-ehecatl, the one who is "invisible (like the night) and intangible (like the wind)".

g. Living in "The House of Paintings"

Nahua tlamatinime standardly characterized earthly existence as consisting of pictures, images, and symbols painted-written by teotl on its sacred amoxtli (Mesoamerican papyrus-like paper). The tlamatini Aquiauhtzin (ca.1430-ca.1500, from Chalco-Amaquemecan), for example, characterized the earth as "the house of paintings" (Cantares mexicanos fol.10 r., trans. by Leon-Portilla 1992:282.). According to Xayacamach (second half of the fifteenth century, from Tlaxcala), "Your home is here, in the midst of the paintings" (Cantares mexicanos fol.11 v., trans. by Leon-Portilla 1992:228). Like the images on amoxtli painted-written by human artists, the images on teotl's sacred canvas are fragile and evanescent. The renowned tlamatini and ruler of Texcoco, Nezahualcoyotl (1402-1472), sung:

With flowers You paint, O Giver of Life!
With songs You give color, with songs you give life on the earth.
Later you will destroy eagles and tigers: we live only in your painting here, on the earth.
With black ink you will blot out all that was friendship, brotherhood, nobility.
You give shading to those who will live on the earth...
we live only in Your book of paintings, here on the earth. (Romances de los senores de Nueva Espana, fol.35 r., trans. by Leon-Portilla 1992:83).

Because they saw everything earthly as teotl's nahual, Nahua tlamatinime claimed everything earthly is dreamlike. Tochihuitzin Coyolchiuhqui sung: "We only rise from sleep, we come only to dream, it is ahnelli [unrooted, untrue] it is ahnelli [unrooted, untrue] that we come on earth to live." (Cantares mexicanos, fol.14v., trans. by Leon-Portilla 1992:153). Once again, Nezahualcoyotl sung:

Is it nelli [rooted, true, authentic] one really lives on the earth?
Not forever on earth, only a little while here.
Though it be jade it falls apart, though it be gold it wears away, though it be quetzal plumage it is torn asunder.
Not forever on this earth, only a little while here.
(Cantares mexicanos, fol 17r., trans. by Leon-Portilla 1992:80).

Nahua tlamatinime conceived the dreamlikeness or illusoriness of earthly existence in epistemological -- not ontological -- terms (pace Leon-Portilla 1963). Illusion was not an ontological category as it was, say, for Plato. In the Republic (Book VI) Plato employed the notion of illusion: to characterize an inferior or lower grade of reality or existence; to distinguish this inferior grade of reality from a superior, higher one (the Forms); and to deny that earthy existence is fully real. This conception of illusion commits one to an ontological dualism that divides the universe into two fundamentally different kinds of existents: illusion and reality.

Nahua tlamatinime employed the concepts of dreamlikeness and illusion as epistemological categories in order to make the epistemological claim that the natural condition of humans is to be deceived by teotl's disguise and misunderstand teotl -- not the metaphysical claim that as teotl's disguise all earthly existence is ontologically substandard and not genuinely real. Earthly existence provides the occasion for human misperception, misjudgment, and misunderstanding. The dreamlike character of earthly existence, the mask of unknowing which beguiles us as human beings, is a function of our human perspective and teotl's artistic self-disguise (these being ultimately one and the same!) -- not a metaphysical dualism inherent in the make-up of things. When Nahua tlamatinime characterized earthly existence as ephemeral and evanescent, they did so not because earthly existence lacks complete reality but because as facets of teotl's disguise they are subject to the endless oscillation of dialectical polar monism. Illusion is a function our mistaking the commonly perceived characteristics of the myriad shapes, structures, and entities of teotl's disguise as characteristics of teotl itself. In sum, the Nahuas' epistemological conception of illusion does not commit them to an ontological dualism between two different kinds of existents -- illusion and reality -- and is therefore consistent with their ontological monism.

A further consequence of Nahua monism is the metaphysical impossibility of human beings perceiving de re anything other than teotl, for teotl is the only thing to be perceived de re! But then how can Nahua tlamatinime claim that humans normally misperceive and misunderstand teotl? Humans normally perceive and conceive teotl de dicto or under a description, e.g. as Nezahualcoyotl, as maleness, as death, as night, etc. When doing so they perceive and conceive teotl's nahual (self-disguise) and consequently perceive and conceive teotl in a manner that is ahnelli -- i.e. untrue, unrooted, inauthentic, unconcealing, and nondisclosing. It is humans' misperceiving and misunderstanding teotl as its disguise (nahual) which prevents them from seeing teotl (reality) as it really is.

The only way humans experience teotl knowingly is to experience teotl sans description. Humans experience teotl knowingly via a process of mystical-style union between their hearts and teotl that enables them to experience teotl directly i.e. without mediation by language, concepts, or categories. One comes to know teotl through teotl. One's perception and conception are no longer befogged by "the cloud of unknowing" (to borrow from the fourteenth century English mystical text by the same name) or the "breath on the mirror" (to borrow from the Mayan Popol Vuh) constituted by de dicto perception and conception. Note however that although metaphysically immanent within human hearts (in keeping with Nahua metaphysical monism), teotl is nevertheless epistemologically transcendent in the sense that humans are not guaranteed knowledge of teotl.

A fundamental metaphysical difference thus divides the underlying problematics of Nahua and Cartesian-style Western epistemology. The latter conceives subject and object dualistically and the relationship between subject and object as one mediated by a "veil of perception". The subject's access to the object is indirect, being mediated, for example, by appearances or representations of the object. The Nahuas' epistemological problematic conceives the subject and object monistically and the relationship between subject and object in terms of a mask. And masks in Mesoamerican epistemology have different properties than veils.

In their study of masks in Mesoamerican shamanism (in which sixteenth-century Nahua epistemology was deeply rooted and to which it remained closely related), Markman and Markman (1989:xx) argue that masks "simultaneously conceal and reveal the innermost spiritual force of life itself". For example, the life/death masks mentioned above simultaneously conceal and reveal the simultaneously neither-alive-nor-dead-yet-both-alive-and-dead figure. The mask does not symbolize, represent, or point to something deeper, something hiding behind itself, for the simultaneously neither-alive-nor-dead-yet-both-alive-and-dead figure rests right upon the surface of the figure. The simultaneously neither-alive-nor-dead-yet-both-alive-and-dead figure does not lurk behind the mask; nor is our access to it obstructed by a veil or representation. It is fully present de re yet hidden de dicto by our unknowing, i.e. by our normal tendency to misperceive reality as exclusively either dead or alive -- as opposed to neither-alive-nor-dead-yet-both-alive-and-dead. After years of ritual preparation, Nahua tlamatinime were able to see the life-death mask de re or "unmasked" as it were, and in so doing discern the complementary unity and interdependence of life and death.

h. Time-space

Nahua metaphysics conceives time and its various patterns as the dynamic unfolding of teotl. Time and space form an indistinguisable time-space continuum. The four cardinal directions, for example, are simultaneously directions of space and time. Weeks, months, seasons, years, and year-clusters all had spatial directions. Time-space is concrete, quantitative, and qualitative. It does not consist of a uniform succession of qualitatively identical moments, nor is it a neutral frame of reference abstracted from terrestrial and celestial events and processes. The quantitative dimensions of time-space are inseparable from its qualitative, symbolic dimensions. Different time-spaces bear different qualities.

All these dimensions coalesced in the activity of Nahua time-space-keeping (astronomy), which included observing, counting, measuring, interpreting, giving an account of, and creating an artistic-written record of various patterns of time-space. Nahua time-space-keeping included tonalpohualli ("counting the days") or counting the days of the 260-day cycle; xiuhpohualli ("counting the years") or counting the days of the 360+5-day cycle; xiuhmolpilli ("binding the years") or counting the 52 years of the "calendar round"; counting the 65 "years" of the cycle of Quetzalcoatl (the Venusian cycle); and counting other cycles in celestial and terrestrial processes. Nahua "time-keepers" (cahuipouhqui) were knowledgeable of the time-space rhythms of teotl and responsible for keeping society and humankind in balance with the cosmos.

Calendrical cycles govern human existence. A person's birth date in the tonalpohualli determines her tonalli: a vital force having important consequences for her character and destiny. The Nahuas used the tonalpohualli to divine the nature of this force. The tonalpohualli assigned different daysigns to each day, each daysign having different effects on a person's character and destiny. Time-space bears destinies, carried burdens, and conveyed these to events falling under its influence. The reckoning of any period of time-space always leads one to investigate the tonalli or "day-time-destiny" associated with it. Everything happening on the earth and in humans' lives from birth to death is the outcome of tonalli.

The history of the universe falls into five successive ages or "suns," each representing the temporary dominance of a different aspect of teotl. The present era, the "Age of the Fifth Sun," is the final one and the one in which the Aztecs believed they lived. Like its four predecessors, the Fifth Sun is destined to cataclysmic destruction, at which time the earth will be destroyed by earthquakes and humankind will vanish forever. (For further discussion, see Lopez Austin 1988, 1997; Leon-Portilla 1963; Read 1998; Carrasco 1990; Maffie [forthcoming].)

3. The Defining Problematic of Nahua Philosophy

a. How Can Humans Maintain their Balance on the Slippery Earth?

The Nahua regarded earthly life as filled with pain, sorrow, and suffering. Indeed, the earth's surface is a treacherous habitat for human beings. Its name, "tlalticpac," literally means "on the point or summit of the earth", suggesting a narrow, jagged, point-like place surrounded by constant dangers (Michael Launey, quoted in Burkhart 1989:58). The Nahuatl proverb, "Tlaalahui, tlapetzcahui in tlalticpac," "It is slippery, it is slick on the earth," was said of a person who had lived a morally upright life but then lost her balance and fell into moral wrongdoing, as if slipping in slick mud (Sahagun 1953-82:VI,p.228, trans. by Burkhart 1989). Humans lose their balance easily on tlalticpac and so suffer misfortune frequently. They therefore desparately need guidance.

Nahua tlamatinime conceived the raison d'etre of philosophy in terms of this situation, and turned to philosophy for practicable answers to what they regarded as the defining question of human existence: How can humans maintain their balance upon the slippery earth? This situation and question jointly constitute the problematic which functions as the defining framework for Nahua philosophy. Morally, epistemologically, and aesthetically appropriate human activity are defined in terms of the goal of humans maintaining their balance upon the slippery earth. All human activities are to be directed towards this aim. At bottom, Nahua philosophy is essentially pragmatic.

Because of this I suggest Nahua philosophy is better understood as a "way-seeking" rather than as a "truth-seeking" philosophy. "Way-seeking" philosophies such as classical Taoism, classical Confucianism, and contemporary North American pragmatism adopt as their defining question, "What is the way?" or "What is the path?". In contrast, "truth-seeking" philosophies such as most European philosophies adopt as their defining question, "What is the truth?" (For discussion see Hall 2001; Hall and Ames 1998; Maffie [ed] 2001.)

To the question, "How can humans maintain their balance upon the slippery earth?", Nahua tlamatinime answered, "Humans must conduct every aspect of their lives wisely". To the question, "What is the best path for humans to follow on the narrow, jagged surface of the earth?", they answered, "The balanced, middle path since it avoids excess and imbalance, hence mistepping and slipping, hence misfortune and ill-being".

b. The Character of Wisdom

Wisdom aims at instructing humans how to maintain their balance (like skilled mountaineers) as they walk upon the narrow, twisting, and jagged path of life upon the summit of the earth (see Burkhart 1989; Gingerich 1988; Leon-Portilla 1963; I. Nicholson 1959). The Nahuas conceived wisdom dynamically in terms of balancing -- a conception rooted in indigenous shamanism (see Eliade 1964; Gingerich 1988; P. Furst 1976; Myeroff 1974) and in their conception of teotl. They conceived wisdom adverbially, not substantively. Wisdom is a characteristic of how one conducts oneself and one's affairs -- not a thing or a set of eternal truths one grasps, apprehends, or possesses. By enabling them to walk in balance, wisdom affords humans some measure of stability and well-being in an otherwise evanescent life filled with pain, sorrow, struggle, and suffering, here on an impermanent, doomed earth.

Nahua sages conceived tlamatiliztli (knowledge, wisdom) in pragmatic, creative, and performative terms rather than in propositional or theoretical terms. Tlamatiliztli consists of non-propositional 'know how' -- not propositional 'knowledge that'. It consists of knowing how to live so as to make one's way safely upon the slippery surface of earth. How do humans become wise? They must become neltiliztli, i.e. well-rooted, authentic, true, and non-referentially disclosing. Their intellectual, emotional, imaginative, and physical dispositions and behavior must become deeply and firmly rooted in teotl.

Tlamatiliztli involved four, ultimately indistinguishable aspects: (1) the practical ability to conduct one's affairs in such a way as to attain some measure of balance and purity--and hence some measure of well-being--in one's personal, domestic, social, and natural surroundings; (2) the practical ability to conduct one's life in such a way as to creatively participate in, reinforce, adapt, and extend into the future the way of life inherited from one's predecessors; (3) the practical ability to conduct one's life in such a way as to participate in the regeneration-cum-renewal of the cosmos, and; (4) the practical know how involved in performing ritual activities which: genuinely present teotl; authentically embody teotl; preserve existing balance and purity; create new balance and purity; and participate alongside teotl in the regeneration of the universe.

The Nahua universe is a "participatory universe" characterized by a "relationship of compelling mutuality" or "interdependence" between humans and universe (Wilbert 1975; see also Leon-Portilla 1993; Lopez Austin 1988, 1997; Read 1998; and Sandstrom 1991). This is simply a consequence of the interrelatedness and oneness of all things. Not only does the universe causally affect humans, but humans causally affect the universe. Human actions promote cosmic harmony, balance, and purity, on the one hand, or cosmic disharmony, imbalance, and impurity, on the other.

The Nahuas conceived moral, psychological, and physical (these all being indistinguishable in their eyes) health, well-being, righteousness, and purity in terms of keeping one's balance on the earth's slippery surface, and so regarded the earth's surface as a psychologically, physically, and morally dangerous place. Nahua wisdom urged humans to act with extreme care and to follow the guidelines of the ancestors -- as any other path would inevitably lead one to stumble down the earth's slopes into psychological, physical, and moral imbalance, perverseness, instability, and disease. With this in mind, a father offered his son the following advice:

... on earth we travel, we live along a mountain peak. Over here there is an abyss, over there there is an abyss. Wherever thou art to deviate, wherever thou art to go astray, there will thou fall, there wilt thou plunge into the deep (Sahagun 1953-82:VI,p.125).

Yet the dire situation of humans on earth did not prompt the Nahuas to reject earthly life in favor of some other-worldly life. The earth's surface is the only realm wherein humans enjoy the full potential for well-being since only here are their various vital forces fully integrated. The Nahuas resolved to live as best they could on tlalticpac. And indeed, earthly life does allow some measure of well-being: sleep, laughter, food, sexual pleasure, conjugal union, and procreation. Yet these were scarce, momentary, and needed to be taken in moderation, as any excess resulted in imbalance. This ambiguous character of earthly life is summarized in a mother's advice to her daughter: "the earth is not a good place. It is not a place of joy; it is not a place of contentment. It is merely said it is a place of joy with fatigue, of joy with pain" (Sahagun 1953-82:VI,p.93).

Nahua philosophers saw humans as creatures yearning for rootedness -- i.e. for a deep, firm, and lasting anchoring for their lives -- and who restlessly search for it. Obtaining well-rootedness enables one to become an "upright man" (tlacamelahuac, trans. by Lopez Austin 1988:I,p.189) and to live a balanced, pure, and genuinely human life. Without roots, one finds neither balance, purity, nor humanness. Obtaining well-rootedness is difficult, and in their search many humans give their hearts to what appears to be well-rooted and authenthic but is not. Since this cannot provide grounding and stability, humans eventually become dissatisfied with it and abandon it, only to begin their search anew, often times repeating the process over and over again. Their hearts eventually become scattered, unbalanced, and lost (Lopez Austin 1988:II, Appendix 5). As Nezahualcoyotl put it, "If you give your heart to each and everything, you lead it nowhere: you destroy your heart" (Cantares mexicanos fol.2, v., trans. by Leon-Portilla 1963:5). Such humans become vagabonds, wandering about aimlessly from one illusion to the next. They become beastly, unstable, unbalanced, impure, perverse, dull-witted, intemperate, and vicious. They fail to realize their humanness and merely appear to be human. They become deceivers, rogues, and dissimulators. They "act on things with [their] humanity dead" (Lopez Austin 1988:I,p.189). They are "lump[s] of flesh with two eyes" (Sahagun 1953-82:X,pp.3,11) and "defective human weight[s]" (Sahagun 1953-82:X,p.11, trans. by Lopez Austin 1988:II,p.271).

The beastly apparent-human eschews the company of other humans and in so doing forsakes his humanness in yet another way. Humans are essentially social; they need the company of others in order to become genuine human beings. Humans are born "faceless" (i.e. incomplete or with undeveloped powers of judgment) and need other humans for the education and discipline needed for acquiring a "face", becoming balanced, and becoming fully human. Developing proper "face and heart" is only possible through the opportunities provided by well-ordered social living. Unstable, foolish, and diseased, the loner slips constantly upon the path of life.

The notion of maintaining one's balance plays a central role in other aspects of Nahua thought. One's mind and body possess or lack balance, and are healthy or not depending upon whether they possess the proper balance of opposing polarities such as hot and cold, dry and wet, etc. (Lopez Austin 1988:I,ch.8). One's home, neighborhood, polity, and environment are healthy or diseased depending upon whether they are balanced or not. Personal, domestic, and social balancedness are interdependent. Imbalance, iimpurity, and ill-being are contagious.

The Nahuas believed the human body serves as the temporary location for three different animistic forces, each residing in its own center. Tonalli (from the root tona, "heat") resides in the head. It provides the body with character, vigor, and the energy needed for growth and development. Individuals acquire their tonalli from the sun. A person's tonalli may leave her body during dreams and shamanic journeys. Tonalli is ritually introduced into an infant as one of her animistic entities. It is closely united to a person as her link to the universe and as determining factor of her destiny. Everything belonging to a human by virtue of her relation to the cosmos received the name of tonalli. Teyolia ("that which gives life to people") resides in the heart. It provides memory, vitality, inclination, emotion, knowledge, and wisdom. Unlike tonalli, one's teyolia is not separable while alive. It "goes beyond after death" and enjoys a postmortem existence in the world of the dead. The Nahuas likened teyolia to "divine fire" (Carrasco 1990:69). Finally, ihiyotl ("breath, respiration") resides in the liver. It provides passion, cupidity, bravery, hatred, love, and happiness.

Every human is the living center and confluence of these three forces. They direct humans' physiological and psychological processes, giving each person her own unique character. All three must operate harmoniously with one another in order to produce a mentally, physically, and morally pure, upright, whole, and balanced person. Disturbance of any one affects the other two. Only during life on earth are all three forces fully integrated within humans. After death, each goes its own way.

Lastly, individuals possess free will within the constraints imposed by their tonalli. One is born with either favorable or unfavorable tonalli and with a corresponding predetermined character. While this places certain constraints upon what one may accomplish, one freely chooses what to make of one's tonalli within these limits. Someone born with favorable tonalli may squander it through improper action; someone with unfavorable tonalli may neutralize its adverse effects through knowledge of the sacred calendar and careful selection of actions. (For further discussion, see Lopez Austin 1988, 1997; J. Furst 1995; Carrasco 1990; Sandstrom 1991.)

4. Epistemology

a. The Raison D'etre of Epistemology

The philosophical problematic above defines the raison d'etre of Nahua epistemology. The aim of cognition from the epistemological point of view is walking in balance upon the slippery earth, and epistemologically appropriate inquiry is that which promotes this aim. Nahua epistemology does not pursue goals such as truth for truth's sake, correct description, and accurate representation; nor is it motivated by the question "What is the (semantic) truth about reality?" Knowing (tlamatiliztli) is performative, creative, and participatory, not discursive, passive or theoretical. It is concrete, not abstract; a knowing how, not a knowing that.

b. Truth as Well-Rootedness-cum-Alethia

Nahua epistemology conceived knowing (tlamatiliztli) in terms of neltiliztli. Scholars standardly translate neltiliztli (and its cognates) as "truth" (and its cognates) (Karttunen 1983; Gingerich 1987; Leon-Portilla 1963). However, unlike most Western philosophers, Nahua philosophers did not understand truth in terms of correspondence (or coherence). According to Leon-Portilla (1963:8), "`truth'... was to be identified with well-grounded stability [well-foundedness or well-rootedness]." To say a person cognizes truly is therefore to say she cognizes with well-grounded stability or well-rootedly. Nahua philosophers thus possessed a concept of truth (neltiliztli) but they conceived truth in terms of well-grounded stability, well-foundedness, and well-rootedness -- not in terms of correspondence, aboutness, representation, reference, fit, or successful description. In short, they understood neltiliztli (truth) non-semantically.

Willard Gingerich (1987:102f.) defends Leon-Portilla's translation-interpretation of neltiliztli. He points out that "truth" occurs in the early post-Conquest sources more often in its adverbial form, nelli, meaning "truly" or "with truth" (which I believe reflects the Nahuas' processive metaphysics). However, Gingerich contends well-rootedness does not exhaust the full meaning of neltiliztli. The Nahuas' understanding of neltiliztli contained an ineliminable Heideggerian component: "non-referential alethia -- [i.e.] 'disclosure,'" (1987:104), "unconcealedness" (1987:102), "self-deconcealing" (1987:105), and "unhiddenness" (1987:105). That which is neltiliztli is both well-rooted and non-referentially unconcealing or disclosing. Nahuas understood neltiliztli (truth) non-semantically, i.e. in terms other than correspondence, reference, representation, and aboutness. In sum, Nahua epistemology conceives neltiliztli in terms of well-rootedness-cum-alethia.

The Nahuas characterized persons, things, activities, and utterances equally and without equivocation in terms of neltiliztli, and understood neltiliztli in terms of well-rootedness in teotl. That which is well-rooted in teotl is genuine, true, authentic, and well-balanced as well as non-referentially disclosing and unconcealing of teotl (Gingerich 1987, 1988; Maffie 2002). Created things exist along a continuum ranging from those that are well-rooted in teotl (i.e. nelli) and hence authentically present and embody teotl as well as disclose and unconceal teotl, at one end, to those things that are poorly rooted in teotl (i.e. ahnelli) and hence neither authentically embody and present teotl nor disclose and unconceal teotl, at the other end. The former, which include fine jade and well-crafted song-poems ("flower and song"), enjoy sacred presence.

c. Cognitive Burgeoning and Flowering

Humans thus cognize knowingly if and only if they cognize with well-rootedness-cum-alethia. They cognize with well-rootedness-cum-alethia if and only if their cognizing is well-rooted in teotl. The Nahuas conceived well-rootedness-cum-alethia in terms of burgeoning (Brotherston 1979). Burgeoning and rootedness are both vegetal notions deriving from the organic world of agricultural life. A plant's flowers and fruits burgeon from its seeds, soil, and roots, and in so doing embody, present, and disclose the latter's qualities. Analogously, cognizing knowingly is a form of cognitive flourishing. It is the flower of an organic-like process consisting of teotl's sap-like burgeoning, unfolding, and blossoming within a person's heart. By doing so, teotl discloses and unconceals itself. As the generative presentation of teotl, human knowing thus represents one of the ways teotl faithfully, genuinely, and authentically discloses itself here on earth. As a consequence, human cognizing moves knowingly: it understands, presents, embodies, enacts, and expresses teotl.

By contrast, unknowing (illusory, befogged) cognizing is poorly if not wholly unrooted (ahnelli) in teotl. It is inauthentic, ingenuine, and undisclosing. Teotl fails to burgeon, flower, and faithfully disclose itself within such cognizing. Unknowing cognition constitutes a form of cognitive crookedness, perversity, or disease. It represents one of the ways by which teotl unfaithfully and inauthetically presents -- i.e. disguises and masks -- itself here on earth.

Humans come to know teotl using their heart -- not head or brain. Situated between head and liver, the heart is uniquely qualified to attain the proper balance of the head's reason and the liver's passion needed for understanding teotl. The heart serves as the center for teyolia, that vital force which induces humans towards that which alone fills their emptiness and gives them roots: teotl. Knowing requires that one possess a yolteotl or "teotlized heart", i.e. a heart charged with teotl's sacred energy and enjoying sacred presence. The "teotlized heart" possesses an extraordinary amount of teyolia. One possessing a "teotlized heart" has "teotl in his heart" and is "wise in the things of teotl" (Lopez Austin 1988:I,pp.258ff., II,pp.245,298; see also Leon-Portilla 1963).

Yollotl, the Nahuatl word for heart, derives from ollin, the Nahuatl word for movement (Lopez Austin 1988). This indicates yet another way in which the heart the organ best suited for knowing teotl way. Teotl is essentially movement. A teotlized heart moves in balance with the movement of teotl, and as a result moves knowingly. As one's heart comes to move knowingly, one becomes "wise in the things of teotl"; one comes to have "teotl in his heart". Teotl presents and discloses itself to and through one's heart. One experiences teotl directly and de re. The de dicto mask of unknowing beguiles one's heart no more.

Teotl is ultimately ineffable since it is undifferentiated and unordered; a seamless totality. Consequently, humans only experience teotl knowingly in a manner unmediated, unspecified, and undefined by language, concepts, and categories (along with their divisions, classification, and distinctions). These are facets of teotl's disguise or mask and thus contribute to humans' de dicto misperceiving and misunderstanding of teotl. To the degree language, concepts, and categories are essential to human reasoning, humans thus understand teotl non-rationally. Alternatively expressed, teotl only genuinely discloses itself non-linguistically, non-discursively, and non-rationally.

d. "Flower and Song"

In light of the preceding, Nahua tlamatinime turned to "flower and song" (poetry, writing-painting, music) to disclose and present (not re-present) teotl as well as display and embody their understanding of teotl. Composing-and-performing song-poems in particular are the highest form of human artistry and the finest way for humans to present teotl since this activity most closely imitates and participates in teotl's own cosmic, creative artistry. Hence song-poems rather than discursive arguments are the appropriate medium of sagely expression, and sages are perforce singer-songwriter-poets.

"Flower and song" comes from a ritually prepared heart that embodies and presents a proper balance of reason and passion, male and female, active and passive, etc. This balance was symbolized in popular Aztec religion by Quetzalcoatl, the "Plummed Serpent", who served as patron deity of artists and sages. By combining the attributes of birds (heaven) and snakes (earth), the "Plummed Serpent" symbolized the union of male and female. Indeed, Quetzalcoatl's joint patronage of sages and artists points to their ultimate identity and to the equivalence of sagacity and artistic excellence.

Acquiring a teotlized heart and becoming knowledgeable of teotl also requires that one engage in "flower and song". Artistic activity epistemologically improves one's heart, causing it move in balance with teotl and hence move knowingly. By engaging in creative artistry humans imitate and participate in -- albeit imperfectly -- the self-transforming, cosmic creativity of teotl. In so doing they fashion their hearts after teotl.

Acquiring a teotlized heart and becoming knowledgeable of teotl also requires that one be well-rooted, well-balanced, pure, authentic, and morally righteous, and that one possess strength, self-control, moderation, and modesty (see Gingerich 1988; Burkhart 1989). Humans must show humility and respect towards teotl before teotl discloses itself. The foregoing characteristics are not only epistemological but moral and aesthetic as well. They not only help humans become knowledgeable and live wisely, they help them live morally, authentically, purely, well-balancedly. and beautifully. Humans cannot become knowledgeable of teotl without becoming genuine, pure, morally righteous and beautiful (and vice versa). In short, the process of epistemological self-improvement is also one of moral and aesthetic self-improvement.

Finally, the Nahuas understood the process of becoming knowledgeable in terms of tlamacehualiztli or "the meriting of things". According to Burkhart (1989:142), tlamacehualiztli derives from the verb macehua, "to obtain or deserve what is desired" (see also Klor de Alva, 1993; Leon-Portilla 1993; Gingerich 1988; Read 1998). Humans come to "merit" -- i.e. "deserve" or "be worthy of" -- tlamatiliztli as a consequence of performing prescribed ritual activities. Humans and teotl coexist in a moral interrelationship of reciprocity, and becoming knowledgeable involves a morally regulated exchange with teotl. When humans behave in ritually prescribed ways, they may expect to attain those things they have come to merit. Tlamatiliztli emerges as a consequence of moral-cum-epistemological-cum-aesthetic interaction and co-participation with teotl.

5. Intrinsic Value: Balance and Purity

Nahua value theory sees balance and purity jointly as the condition that is ideal as well as intrinsically valuable and worth-cultivating for humans. To the degree humans approximate balance-and-purity in their lives, they perfect their humanness and flourish; to the degree they do not, they destroy their humanness and suffer beastly, miserable lives. Nahua theory of intrinsic value is rooted in Nahua metaphysics in the following way. Teotl functions as the ultimate source and standard of intrinsic value since balance-and-purity are properties of teotl. Teotl's own balance-and-purity are genuinely embodied and presented in well-formed quetzal tail feathers, jade, and turquoise. Thet are green: the color of balance, purity, life, renewal, and well-being (Sahagun 1953-82:XI, pp.224,248; see also Gingerich 1988; Burkhart 1989.) One obtains this balance-and-purity by rooting oneself firmly and deeply in teotl.

6. Moral Theory: How to Live in Balance and Purity

Nahua philosophy reflects upon the appropriateness of human conduct, attitudes, and states of affairs from the standpoint of achieving, restoring, and maintaining balance-and-purity. This single point of view encompasses under a single rubric what Western thought standardly divides into moral, religious, political, legal points of view. Nahua philosophers saw no significant difference between these, however. For simplicity's sake I discuss this single point of view using the terms "morality", "ethics" and their cognates.

Nahua morality is rooted in the claim that balance-and-purity constitute the ideal condition as well as what is intrinsically valuable for humans, and derives two fundamental moral precepts from this claim: humans should promote balance-and-purity and avert imbalance-and-impurity. Nahua morality accordingly appraised the moral appropriateness of conduct, attitudes, and states of affairs in light of their consequences upon balance-and-purity. Morally appropriate conduct, for example, is that which promotes, sustains or renews balance-and-purity or that which averts imbalance-and-impurity; morally inappropriate conduct is that which disrupts existing balance-and-purity or creates new imbalance-and-impurity (see Burkhart 1988; Gingerich 1988; Lopez Austin 1988, 1997). Good intentions do not suffice; one must actually succeed.

Nahua ethics standardly characterizes morally appropriate conduct as in quallotl in yecyotl, i.e. as that which is "fitting for" and "assimilable by" humans in the sense of contributing to their balance-and-purity. Morally appropriate conduct helps humans "assume a face," "develop a heart," and enrich their life. It helps them become authentically human. Morally inappropriate conduct, on the other hand, causes humans to leave their heart undeveloped, lose their face, and impoverish their lives. It causes them to become lumps of flesh with two eyes. (See Leon-Portilla 1963:146-48; Burkhart 1989:38ff.; Gingerich 1988:524; Lopez Austin 1988, 1997.)

The soundest, wisest course is moderation. One should neither do too much nor too little of anything: e.g. eating, sleeping, or bathing. If one overindulges by feasting, one must restore balance by overindulging in its contrary, fasting. Acting wisely consists of walking a middle path between two extremes. As a Nahuatl proverb proclaims: tlacoqualli in monequi: "the center good is required," "the middle good is necessary" (Sahagun 1953-82:VI, p.231, trans. by Burkhart 1989:134).

Nahua ethics also employs the notion of tlatlacolli -- i.e. damage, harm or spoilage -- when characterizing the moral character of conduct (Burkhart 1989:28). Immoral conduct is tlatlacolli because it causes an entity to suffer a loss of balance, which in turn causes it to suffer decay, disorder, randomness, and spoilage. Spoilage in humans, for example, typically results in physical or psychological disease. Nahua ethics also uses the notions of purity and impurity in this regard. The basic Nahuatl pollution concept is tlazolli, the most literal meaning of which is, "something useless, used up, something that has lost its original order or structure and has been rendered loose and undifferential matter" (Burkhart 1989:88). Immorality is identified with dirt and filth. Immoral behavior is dirty because it pollutes the actor(s) involved, e.g. two adulterers. Purity and impurity are closely related to spoilage. Moral impurity is a form of spoilage accompanied by a loss of balance.

Nahua ethics had a this-worldly rather than other-worldly orientation. Its foundation and justification rested in human nature, the nature of life on earth, and ultimately the nature of the teotl -- not in the commandments of some remote deity. The Nahuas' search for the correct codes of conduct was not motivated by a desire for reward in an afterlife, nor did it presuppose the possibility of determining one's destiny after death. There was no talk of punishment or reward in an afterlife for the kind of life one led on earth.

This notwithstanding, Nahua morality did prescribe a way of life which promised well-being here on earth. The Nahuas believed the destiny of humankind in the beyond to exceed human control and knowledge, and concluded that the rewards and punishments for earthly conduct are earthly. These included conversation, health, laughter, sleep, strength, sexual pleasure, honor, longevity and respect in the case of morally appropriate behavior; hunger, pain, sorrow, insanity, physical deformity and disease in the case of inappropriate behavior.

The Nahuas characterized education as "the art of strengthening or bringing up men" (tlacahuapahualiztli) and "the act of giving wisdom to the face" (neixtlamachiliztli). Humans are born incomplete and "faceless" (i.e. without character) yet are perfectible through proper education (Leon-Portilla 1963; Lopez Austin 1988). Education aims at perfecting children by developing in them "a wise face and a strong, humanized heart" and fashioning their character into a "well smoked, precious turquoise" (Sahagun 1953-82:VI,p.113). This equips them with the means for keeping their balance on the slippery earth. Towards this end Nahua education sought to cultivate dispositions that enable humans to live well (such as self-control, self-sufficiency, moderation, modesty, and personal and domestic hygiene) and extricate dispositions that disable humans (such as pride, intemperance, carelessness, duplicity, uncleanliness, gluttony, and drunkenness).

Only tlamatinime were qualified to cultivate wisdom in people. In his/her capacity as educator, moralist, and role model -- i.e. as "teacher of people's faces" (teixtlamachtiani) -- the sage is akin to an artist who skillfully shapes a formless block of stone into a beautiful statue. The sage shapes a child's "faceless", lump of human flesh into a genuinely human "face and heart". Of the sage the Nahuas said:

The wise man: a light, a torch, a stout torch that does not smoke.
A perforated mirror, a mirror pierced on both sides.
His are the black and red ink, his are the illuminated manuscripts, he studies the illuminated manuscripts.
He himself is writing and wisdom.
He is the path, the true way for others.
He directs people and things; he is a guide in human affairs.
Teacher of truth, he never ceases to admonish.
He makes wise the countenances of others; to them he gives a face; he leads them to develop it.
He opens their ears; he enlightens them.
He puts a mirror before others, he makes them prudent, cautious; he causes a face to appear on them.
He attends to things; he regulates their path, he arranges and commands.
He applies his light to the world.
Thanks to him people humanize their will and receive a strict education.
(Codice Matritense de la Real Academia, VIII,fol.118, r.- 118,v. trans. by Leon-Portilla 1963:10-11).

"Face and heart" (in ixtli in yollotl) expresses the notion of character (Leon-Portilla 1963). To possess a "perfected, wise face and good heart" is to exhibit sound judgment and sentiment: one's psychological, intellectual, and physical behavior promotes balance-and-purity and averts imbalance-and-impurity. The person with "good heart, humane and stout" has is wise in the ways of teotl. The person lacking such a heart has an "enshrouded heart" (Leon-Portilla 1963:175). He is mad, foolish, and dull-witted.

The Nahuas likened the person with a "wise face and good heart" to well-formed quetzal plumage, jade, and turquoise. These objects faithfully and authentically present teotl's balance-and-purity. They are green, the color of balance, purity, life, renewal, and well-being (Sahagun 1953-82:XI, pp.224,248). As one of Sahagun's Nahua informants put it:

...the pure life is considered as a well-smoked, precious turquoise: as a round, reedlike, well-formed, precious green stone. There is no blotch, no blemish. Those perfect in their hearts, in their manner of life, those of pure life -- like these are the precious green stone, the precious turquoise, which are glistening... They are those of pure life, those called good-hearted (Sahagun 1953-82:VI, p.113).

Living wisely also requires performing ritual activities devoted to restoring lost balance-and-purity or to averting future imbalance-and-impurity. Such activities included penitence, mortification, and "straightening one's heart" (neyolmelahualiztli; "confession") (Burkhart 1989:214). These helped restore balance to one's heart by purifying it of tlazolli, by casting off tlatlacolli, and returning it to its proper shape. Humans also acquired moral "merit" through self-deprivation, moderation, and penitential self-denial.

7. Aesthetics

The Nahuas used the expression "flower and song" to refer to artistic activity and its products. Broadly construed, "flower and song" refers to creative activity generally including composing-performing song-poems, painting-writing, playing music, featherworking, and goldsmithing. However, translating-interpreting "flower and song" in this manner is potentially misleading. For the Nahuas did not have a concept of art in the modern Western sense of "art for art's sake" i.e. in the sense that "art and works of art deserve the title by virtue of being products and activities with no other purpose than their contemplation" (Wilkinson 1998:383). Since the Nahuas did not produce objects soley for aesthetic contemplation, we might, then, rightly say that in this sense the Nahuas did not do or make art. They had no notion of a distinctly aesthetic -- as opposed to moral or epistemological -- point of view from which to judge the value (or beauty) of human creativity activity and its products. Rather, Nahua philosophers conceived aesthetics in terms of the problematic defining all philosophical speculation: helping humans maintain their balance on the slippery surface of the earth. As with all other human activities, creative activity and its products are meant to help humans maintain their balance and evaluated accordingly. Aesthetics is thus interwoven with moral and epistemological purposes. That which is aesthetically valuable (or beautiful) is also morally valuable and epistemologically valuable (and conversely). It is the well-rooted, well-balanced, true, disclosing, and pure. That which is aesthetically valueless (or ugly) is disordered, duplicitous, perverse, unbalanced, impure, and deceptive since unrooted, undisclosing, inauthentic, and false.

Nahuas aesthetics views creative activity and its products in the following terms. First, creative activity and its products are aesthetically valuable if and only if they genuinely present and truly disclose teotl. Like well-formed jade, turquoise, and quetzal plumes, they authentically unconceal balance-and-purity.

Secondly, creative activity and its products are aesthetically valuable if and only if they contribute positively to the existing store of balance-and-purity in the cosmos. Works of art accomplish this by faithfully presenting and hence actually embodying balance-and-purity, i.e. by literally being well-balanced and pure.

Third, aesthetically valuable creative activity and products must spring forth from a morally and epistemologically qualifed, "teotlized heart", and hence burgeon from and be well-rooted in teotl. The accomplished artist is necessarily morally upright and knowledgable of teotl. Fools and rogues are incapable of creating beautiful works of art.

Fourth, aesthetically valuable creative activity and its products must have the appropriate effects upon their audience. Beautiful art improves and uplifts its audience psychologically, physically, morally, and epistemologically. It promotes psychological and physical balance-and-purity, moral righteousness, and proper understanding of teotl, and consequently helps humans attain greater degrees of humaness and well-being. By contrast, ugly art promotes physical and psychological imbalance-and-impurity, immorality, depravity, misunderstanding, and ill-being.

8. Conclusion

The ephemerality and fragility of earthly life loomed large over Conquest-era the Nahuatl-speaking peoples. Nahua wisdom aimed at enabling them to make the best of life under such circumstances by helping them to walk in balance upon the slippery earth. Walking in balance was simultaneously a moral, epistemological, practical, and aesthetic notion: it involved one's being well-rooted, authentic, knowledgeable, true, pure, morally upright, and beautiful. A life wisely lived offered humans a fleeting, momentary repose from the inevitable sorrow, suffering, and transience of earthly existence. It enabled humans, if only momentarily, to flower and sing.

9. References and Further Reading

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Author Information

James Maffie
University of Maryland
U. S. A.