Category Archives: Medieval Philosophy

Maimonides (1138—1204)

MaimonidesMaimonides is a medieval Jewish philosopher with considerable influence on Jewish thought, and on philosophy in general. Maimonides also was an important codifier of Jewish law. His views and writings hold a prominent place in Jewish intellectual history.

His works swiftly caused considerable controversy, especially concerning the relations between reason and revelation. Indeed, scholarly debates continue on Maimonides’ commitments to philosophy and to Judaism as a revealed religion. However, there is no question that his philosophical works have had a profound impact extending beyond Jewish philosophy. For instance, Aquinas and Leibniz are among the non-Jewish philosophers influenced by Maimonides.

This discussion of his philosophy focuses on some key features and themes rather than aiming to be a comprehensive survey. In particular, attention is drawn to ways in which Maimonides’ philosophical and religious thought were intertwined, focusing on the role of reason and intellectual perfection. In addition, the article highlights some of the significant ways he departs from Aristotle, while also borrowing from him. Maimonides was influenced by Aristotelian and Neoplatonic thought, and both of them have a significant presence, modified by his own original contributions.

Table of Contents

  1. Some Context and Biography
  2. Judaism and Philosophy
  3. The Relation to Aristotle’s Philosophy
  4. Some Fundamental Metaphysical and Epistemological Issues
  5. Maimonides on the Limits of Knowledge
  6. Philosophical Anthropology, Prophecy, and Perfection
  7. Maimonides on Ethical and Intellectual Virtue
  8. Some Key Elements of Moral Epistemology and Moral Psychology
  9. Freedom of the Will, Repentance, and Covenant
  10. The Issue of Esotericism
  11. Conclusion
  12. References and Further Reading

1. Some Context and Biography

After the destruction of the Second Temple by the Romans in 70 C.E., the Talmud became vitally important to Jewish life, both ritually and intellectually. The continuity and coherence of Jewish national life, their life as a people, was largely grounded in the fact that Jewish law bound them together despite diaspora and lack of political self-rule. Talmud was studied intensively, its contents being elaborated and developed to meet the varied conditions of economic, social, and political life. Talmud constitutes the most central collection of interpretation, explication, and commentary on the commandments in Torah, traditionally held to be six hundred and thirteen in number. Knowledge of Talmud, study of it, commentary upon it, and following its guidance bound Jews together as a people in covenant with God.

In addition to being an expert on scripture and Talmud, Maimonides was an important judge and legal official in the Jewish community in Egypt.  He was a physician in the Muslim court in Egypt and had extensive correspondence with Jews far and wide, writing detailed responses to questions of Jewish law and scriptural interpretation. Those of his works that are categorized as ‘philosophy’ reflect interests he had in addition to his religious commitments.

The prospects of medieval Jewish communities often depended upon the disposition of the Christian or Islamic rulers of the areas in which Jews lived. As is the case for several other important medieval Jewish philosophers, the larger intellectual culture in which Maimonides lived and worked was Islamic rather than Christian.

Maimonides (Moses ben Maimon)was born in Cordoba, Spain, and within a few years his family felt the need to flee persecution. They led a wandering life for several years and then settled in North Africa. They had fled the Iberian Peninsula after an especially intolerant Islamic dynasty came to power. Maimonides visited the Holy Land briefly and was distressed at the condition of Jews living there. He then spent much of his adult life in Fostat, the Old City of Cairo, near modern-day Cairo.

Maimonides and others in his family depended to a large extent on his younger brother, a successful merchant. His brother was lost at sea during a journey across the Indian Ocean, and Maimonides wrote that the loss of his brother pained him profoundly, leading him into depression. No longer having the support of his brother’s commercial successes, Maimonides made his living as a physician. In the latter part of his life he was physician to a Grand Vizier who was ruling Egypt for the Sultan Saladin. Though he wrote enormously important works on Jewish law he did not believe that one should be paid for being a teacher of Torah and Talmud.

He also wrote works on medicine and diseases, on various sciences, and other subjects. He conducted extensive correspondence with Jewish communities far and wide on diverse matters, from details of religious observance to how to respond when confronted with a choice between death and conversion. (See, for example, his Epistle to Yemen in Halkin and Hartman.) His codification of Jewish law, Mishneh Torah, remains a much studied and important work in the lives of Orthodox Jewish communities to this day. He led an almost breathlessly busy life as physician, judge, codifier of Jewish law, philosopher, scientist, and teacher. The rigors of his responsibilities are described in a letter to Samuel ben Judah ibn Tibbon, the man who translated Guide of the Perplexed from its original Arabic into Hebrew. Maimonides became quite widely known and respected by Jews and Muslims alike. He died in 1204 and his death was felt as a considerable loss.

Maimonides remains an important philosopher and key figure in Jewish religious tradition, offering extensive guidance on matters of Jewish law and Jewish life. Though there is a longstanding debate within Judaism over whether the central role ascribed to reason by Maimonides is in tension with Judaism as a revelation-based religious tradition it is difficult to imagine Judaism without his influence. Also, as noted above, he was an important influence on non-Jewish philosophers, such as Aquinas, Leibniz, and also on Spinoza, who had his own controversial place in Jewish thought.

Maimonides had encyclopedic knowledge of Jewish law and one of his main projects was to try to organize the massive, complex body of interpretation, argument, and elaboration in a systematic, orderly manner. By doing this, he intended to obviate the need for further codification and interpretation. He sought to provide a normatively authoritative presentation of Jewish law. His aim was to articulate what he took to be the correct interpretation of the law without also including the argumentation that yielded his interpretation. The aim was to make the law accessible, to make it easier to find and follow what the law required. The work that resulted, the Mishneh Torah, was a formidable achievement. While it did not bring interpretation and codification of Jewish law to closure, it has remained throughout the centuries a vitally important guide to Jewish law for large numbers of Orthodox Jews. In that respect, it has more than just historical importance.

Maimonides’ most famous philosophical work, Guide of the Perplexed, was written to a former student as a series of letters. The student, a young man named Joseph, had written to ask how to reconcile his commitment to Judaism and Jewish tradition on the one hand with his commitment to reason and demonstrative science on the other. Joseph was himself a very capable and learned individual, and the Guide is the subtle, complex, layered series of letters written by Maimonides in reply.

2. Judaism and Philosophy


During the period when Maimonides lived, a small number of Islamic thinkers were attached to sultanates in something like a position of ‘court philosopher,’ to build libraries, increase knowledge, and preserve the ancient inheritance. In the Christian world there were cathedral schools and, by the twelfth and thirteenth centuries, a number of universities. In contrast, Jews were scattered and the Temple in Jerusalem, formerly the locus of priestly ritual, had been destroyed centuries earlier. Following that destruction and the huge wave of killing by the Romans, Judaism survived in large measure through the development of the rabbinic tradition, to which Talmud was crucial. This is relevant to Maimonides as a philosopher because so much of his work was the project of articulating what he took to be the philosophical wisdom in Scripture and Jewish law. There is a powerful rationalistic disposition in Maimonides’ thought, and this included the way he understood religious texts.

In the tenth century Saadia Gaon set much of the agenda of medieval Jewish philosophy in The Book of Beliefs and Opinions. A ‘gaon’ is a head of one of the great Talmudic academies; Saadia was head of the academy in Sura, in present-day Iraq. Saadia’s thought was not clearly Neoplatonic, nor was it clearly Aristotelian. Nonetheless, he was a sophisticated thinker, and one of the main themes of his great work is that Judaism is vindicated by reason. The Book of Beliefs and Opinions opens with an extensive discussion of epistemological issues in which Saadia was anxious to show how Judaism is a religion of reason. He argued that, while revelation is real, much of the substance of what is revealed can be understood in rational terms and is not ultimately a matter of mystery. Saadia was influenced by kalam, (Islamic dialectical theology, and Maimonides criticized him for it. Maimonides regarded kalam as less rationally rigorous than philosophy. Nevertheless, Saadia’s work is important as background and intellectual context. Maimonides saw himself as improving upon the theses Saadia defended and the arguments Saadia developed. In addition, the intellectual context included some important Neoplatonic Jewish thinkers, such as Isaac Israeli and Solomon ibn Gabirol, and some sharp critics of rationalism, such as Judah Halevi.

For a thinker like Maimonides it is very difficult, and in some ways artificial, to separate his philosophical thought from his religious thought. An unhelpful way of looking at this is to believe his religious commitments unduly bias his philosophy or make his philosophical conclusions only valuable to those who share his religious beliefs. It is better to recognize that the sorts of intellectual motivations and presuppositions that influence a thinker’s philosophy can illuminate its claims and commitments. Moreover, many medieval philosophers were very rigorous thinkers, bold in argumentation and in critiquing predecessors, and they departed from predecessors in important ways. Many exhibited a high level of analytical acuity. That is certainly true of Maimonides.

Maimonides did not write purely philosophical works. His works that are regarded as philosophical address issues motivated by religious ideas and concerns. However, Maimonides held that reason and revelation concern one body of truth; each is a mode of access to truth, and he thought there was significant philosophical wisdom in revelation. This is a theme that will run through the rest of this discussion.

Maimonides’ negative theology, his intellectualist conception of human virtue, and his conception of the epistemological role of tradition—to pick just a few examples—are philosophically significant despite the very numerous differences between his time and ours.

As noted above, Maimonides’s great philosophical work, Guide of the Perplexed, was written to a young man who was both a committed Jew and strongly interested in philosophy and the authority of rational understanding. He wrote to Maimonides for guidance on how to reconcile, or not, those two commitments. It is a very challenging work. Maimonides himself notes that it contains obscurities and contradictions, in large part on account of the need to reach different audiences with different levels of philosophical understanding. There is a scholarly debate about whether Maimonides was ultimately ‘loyal’ to philosophy or to Judaism.The debate concerns the degree to which Maimonides’ thought involves an esoteric message threatening to religious orthodoxy but likely not to be grasped by non-philosophers.

The present discussion does not examine that debate directly. Instead, it focuses on what appear to be the chief philosophical conceptions shaping his thought. To be sure, even if the debate about esotericism is not taken up explicitly, the views presented are relevant at least by implication; complete neutrality on the issue is not possible. Still, the main aim here is to survey the content and character of key elements of Maimonides’ philosophy without also examining and evaluating recent scholarly debates about it.

3. The Relation to Aristotle’s Philosophy


There are many respects in which Maimonides’ philosophy borrows from Aristotle. Maimonides noted that he esteemed Aristotle’s philosophical achievement as the pinnacle of unaided reason. In addition, Islamic philosophers, much of whose thought owed a great deal to Aristotle, influenced Maimonides (see Ibn Rush (Averroes), Avicenna (Ibn Sin)). Their Aristotelianism often involved elements of Platonism, interwoven in often complex ways. Still, it is clear that from metaphysics to logic to philosophical anthropology to ethics, Maimonides used many of Aristotle’s concepts and philosophical categories. However, he often used them in un-Aristotelian ways, ways shaped by Maimonides’ guiding concerns, which were not always shared by Aristotle. For instance, freedom of the will was vitally important to Maimonides because of its significance in regard to following, or not following, the commandments. Maimonides’ conception of the virtues differed from Aristotle’s in many respects on account of Maimonides’ concern with holiness.

Maimonides’ views on creation, revelation, and redemption depart from Aristotle’s views, even though they are joined to Aristotelian conceptions and insights. Tracing out the implications of creation, revelation, and redemption is a way of understanding many of the differences between Maimonides and the ancient inheritance. To a large extent, that inheritance had been modified by commentators on the ancients and by successors to the ancients. As such, the Aristotelianism Maimonides encountered had already been modified to some degree by Arabic commentators. Some of the commentators, Al-Farabi for example, made little distinction between Plato and Aristotle. Much of the philosophy in the few centuries before Maimonides was what we might call ‘Neoplatonic Aristotelianism.’ In Maimonides’ works there are quite evident Platonic, as well as Aristotelian, influences.

Maimonides argued that Torah contained philosophical wisdom and that the most complete understanding of Torah is philosophical understanding.Thus, creation, revelation, and redemption are at the very core of Maimonides’ understanding of all of reality. In The Guide of the Perplexed Maimonides argues that the eternity of the world is not demonstrable. He undertook a detailed analysis of the reasoning in favor of the world’s eternity and concluded that it could be neither proved nor disproved. In that situation, we are to rely on what is made known to us by revelation but not by a simple, dogmatic assertion of faith. Rather, close study of Torah on the basis of epistemically and explanatorily sound principles leads us to belief in a First Cause as creator, which providentially governs the world with concern for the beings created in its image, that is, rational beings. Thus, the relationship between human beings and the First Cause is understood in a significantly different way than in Aristotle’s philosophy.

One of the chief differences is that the world is the result of a free act of creation, rather than a necessary emanation, as in many Neoplatonic conceptions, involving no volitional element. Emanation appears to have a role in Maimonides’ conception of the world order, though he emphasizes the significance of creation ex nihilo by God as bringing the world order into existence. That there is a world is not to be explained by it processing by necessity, from the First Cause. Thus, the very existence of things is seen as reflecting God’s graciousness rather than metaphysical necessitation. The relations between the several intellects ordering the different spheres that constitute the world are sometimes described by Maimonides as being related by a process of overflow, each emanating from the one immediately superior to it. The relations between causality, agency, emanation, and overflow are complex and perplexing. It is very difficult to sort them out definitively in Maimonides’ thought. Nonetheless, he does appear to have held that God is First Cause, God freely created the world, and God sustains the world in existence.

Aristotle understood the existence of the world as necessary, given the essence of the First Cause. According to him, God does not make the world and does not will a created order into existence. The causality of the First Cause is not exercised by, for instance, creating the world ex nihilo or even creating it out of a formless pre-existing material substratum. Aristotle, in contrast to some Neoplatonic Aristotelians, did not regard the world as emanating from the First Cause. He also did not regard the world as existing contingently, based on volition of the First Cause.

For Maimonides creation is so important because the First Cause is understood to have brought the world into existence through benevolence and wisdom, reflected in the created order. Through study of the created order we can enlarge our understanding of God. Revelation is so important because it means that human beings receive help through divine graciousness. Through the giving of Torah human beings are provided with direction to perfection. This includes guidance regarding repentance and how to return to God when one sins. Redemption—understood here as the culmination of providence—is important because it means that the created order is under divine governance. That means that there is what we might call ‘ultimate’ or ‘cosmic’ justice. Human beings may not fully understand the wisdom and goodness of the created order, consider Job for example, but they can be confident that it is indeed governed by divine reason and justice.

4. Some Fundamental Metaphysical and Epistemological Issues

Because creation has implications for a great many issues in Maimonides’ philosophy, it is suitable as a starting point for discussing some main elements of Maimonides’ metaphysical views.

Maimonides examined what he took to be the three main approaches to accounting for the world. They are (i) a free act of creation ex nihilo, (ii) imposition of form on pre-existing matter, (iii) eternal emanation. In this last approach the world did not come into being ex nihilo or de novo. Maimonides did not claim to have demonstrative proof that God created the world ex nihilo and de novo. Neither did he claim that he could conclusively refute the second and third approaches. Among Jewish thinkers there were some who accepted a Platonist view that God imposed form on pre-existent matter. However, Maimonides held that we should accept the Biblical story of creation, suitably interpreted in philosophical terms. There is nothing inconsistent or incoherent in it, and we have the authority of the Bible with which to support it.

Maimonides held that God so far exceeds our capacity to have knowledge of the divine nature that we are severely limited in how we are able to describe or comprehend God. Even substance cannot be predicated of God in the sense with which we use the word to express knowledge of entities in the created order. In the terms of Maimonides’ negative theology, we would not describe God as the most powerful, all-knowing, incorruptible substance at the top of a hierarchy of substances. That is a positive conception. However, we can say things about God on the basis of what we can know about the effects of divine activity, not the activity itself. “Every attribute that is found in the books of the deity…is therefore an attribute of His action and not an attribute of His essence”(Guide of the Perplexed, I, 53, p. 121).

We can say that God is gracious or that God is powerful or merciful as long as we remain mindful that these phrases describe attributes of the world and do not directly refer to God.  Thus, we can speak of features of God’s actions but not God’s attributes. To speak of attributes would be to speak of properties of God, something God’s transcendence makes impossible. Still, we are not limited to utter silence regarding God. There is much we can say about the created order and about the effects of God’s causal activity though we cannot understand divine activity in its own right. God’s unity, the simplicity of the divine nature, is not a unity of parts, properties, or powers. It is beyond our capacity of positive comprehension though we see the benevolence and wisdom of the created order. Our use of language in speaking of God is equivocal in relation to its use in speaking of other things. That is, it is neither univocal with its use in other contexts, nor is it analogical to use in other contexts. (There is a helpful discussion of approaches to religious language in the article on that topic in this encyclopedia.)

Maimonides’ denial that in talk of God terms are used with meanings that are univocal with or analogous to their use in other contexts may seem to undermine our ability to use language to say anything at all when speaking of God. It may seem to cut us off from any grounding of semantic meaning in that context. Still, Maimonides held that negative theology was needed in order not to misrepresent divine simplicity and that speaking of what God causes is a meaningful way to speak of God.

Maimonides argued that our comprehension of God is limited to negations, for example negations of finitude, ignorance, plurality, corporeal existence, and so forth. Our use of terms such as ‘knowledge,’ ‘justice,’ ‘benevolence,’ and ‘will’ in speaking of God is equivocal. Such terms do not have the same meaning when predicated of human beings as they do when applied to God.

In the Guide, in regard to the application of predicates to God, Maimonides wrote:

[B]etween our knowledge and His knowledge there is nothing in common, as there is nothing in common between our essence and His essence. With regard to this point, only the equivocality of the term “knowledge” occasions the error; for there is a community only in the terms, whereas in the true reality of the things there is a difference. It is from this that incongruities follow necessarily, as we imagine that things that obligatorily pertain to our knowledge pertain also to His knowledge (Guide, III, 20, p. 482).

It is not simply that we lack the concepts with which to represent God’s power, knowledge, benevolence, and so forth; it is that God so completely transcends every created entity and conception available to human reason that in attempting to describe God we are silenced. We know that God exists, is a unity, and is eternal. We know this via revelation. Anything else to be said of God can only be said by describing the effects of God’s activity.

Maimonides wrote, “It has also become clear in metaphysics that by our intellects we are unable to attain perfect comprehension of His existence, may He be exalted. This is due to the perfection of His existence and the deficiency of our intellects. His existence has no causes by which He could be known” (Maimonides, “Eight Chapters,” in Ethical Writings of Maimonides, Ch. VIII, pp. 94-5). Thus, in Maimonides’ view, “It therefore follows that we do not know His knowledge either, nor do we comprehend it in any way, since He is His knowledge and His knowledge is He” (“Eight Chapters,” p. 95).

It would be a serious error to think that God’s knowledge is the same kind of knowledge as human knowledge only more complete. It would also be erroneous to think that God’s volitional power is the same type of power as human volition, only without the limitations to which humans are subject. Maimonides’ negative theology was a strategy for preserving the utter and complete uniqueness of God while also not being rendered utterly silent and inarticulate in regard to God and divine attributes. Through the created order we understand that God is wise, benevolent, all-powerful, eternal, one, and unchanging. However, we must be careful in how we use language about God because the unity of God’s nature implies that predicating multiple attributes of God is already an error unless it is understood through negative theology.

Maimonides’ approach had to come to grips with Scripture’s extensive use of descriptive terms in speaking of God. We are told that God is forgiving and merciful, long-suffering and patient, that God is generous and loving, that God becomes angry, and that God is jealous and insists on being the unique object of worship. For a great many people the understanding of God, the commandments, and human beings’ relationship to God depends heavily on the use of descriptively rich language. Like some other medieval philosophers, Maimonides held that the same truths could be represented and conveyed by different means, in accord with different levels of sophistication of understanding. For those not capable of philosophical understanding metaphysical principles and demonstrative proofs would be inscrutable and uninformative. They needed to hear truths about God in an idiom accessible to them. The same truths could be articulated and explicated in terms of philosophical understanding.

The anthropomorphic language of Scripture is suited to convey important truths to ‘ordinary,’ non-philosophical understanding. Philosophical understanding can interpret the idiom of Scripture in a way that ascertains its metaphysical meaning. Maimonides concurred with many Jewish thinkers in holding that “[t]he Torah speaks in accordance with the language of the children of Man.” That language is sufficiently rich to speak to the ‘plain person’ and the philosopher.

The sort of negation intended by Maimonides’ negative theology reflects the fact that language cannot capture and express God’s nature. Kenneth Seeskin illustrates this:

If I say that this horse does not lack the ability to run, you would be justified in concluding that its running ability is unimpaired….this cannot be what Maimonides says about God because even if God is superlatively powerful, we would still be assigning God to the class of powerful things. Instead what Maimonides means is that God is not in the class of things that are either powerful or weak in the normal sense of the term. God does not lack power, but neither is God’s power comparable with other things (Kenneth Seeskin, p. 89).

As Seeskin puts the point, “God falls under no description” (Seeskin, p.88). How then are we to imitate God by being righteous, showing loving kindness, and exercising judgment? As noted above, Maimonides’ solution is that we can comprehend and describe features of the created order, features of what God has brought about or what God has done. What we predicate of the world is not also to be predicated of God. Rather, we find that the created order reflects graciousness and benevolence, which is something distinct from God, who is the cause of it.

However, it was crucial to show that the language of the Torah did not mean literally that God is corporeal. Indeed, that would be the profoundest error of all. Nor did the fact that the Israelites were commanded to perform sacrifices mean that idolatry was acceptable. Such matters reflect the fact that truths need to be expressed in ways that are accessible to ordinary persons. Moreover, with time and the discipline of practice, it is possible for understanding to be deepened and enlarged. Sacrifice is, as it were, a stage on the way to a religion of prayer, which is a stage on the road to a religion of understanding. The commandments, in their complex wisdom regarding human nature, guide in the direction of increasingly rational religion. Maimonides maintained that there is no distinct religious understanding or faculty of religious knowledge. All cognition is intellectual cognition. That is true of prophecy as well as metaphysics. Moreover, Maimonides interpreted religious practice in a way that highlights God’s wisdom concerning what is needed to help human beings do and understand the things that will perfect them.

An important element of Maimonides’ view is that philosophical wisdom and fundamental truths about reality contained in Scripture and Jewish tradition  were known to a much earlier age but have since been lost and need to be retrieved. He held that those parts of Scripture concerning “the account of the beginning” contain fundamental truths about the natural world, or physics, and those concerning “the account of the chariot” in Ezekiel contain fundamental truths of metaphysics. One must master a very difficult process of learning to ascertain those truths. For example, Scripture contains a great deal of anthropomorphism, but Abraham and the patriarchs, Maimonides argued, understood that the existence of an eternal, incorporeal God could be demonstrated.

While we cannot have a positive conception of God’s nature, we can know that metaphysically a First Cause must exist, and through study of the created order, we can have knowledge of the effect of divine activity. Maimonides’ negative theology is a barrier to ascribing anthropomorphisms to God but it is not a barrier to knowledge of God’s existence or knowledge of features of the world God made. This is a strongly philosophical conception of religion. According to it, fulfilling the commandments is the way to develop one’s capacities and dispositions so that it is possible to come to understand the philosophical truths of the Hebrew Bible.

Maimonides’ insistence on the integral place of philosophy in Judaism was highly objectionable to many traditionalists though Maimonides understood his own work as explicating the truths of tradition rather than rejecting tradition or suggesting that it is anachronistic. He did not seek to replace tradition with philosophy but to articulate the rationality of tradition and show the ways in which philosophical depth and truth are present in Jewish thought and tradition. His thought resonated with Platonic and Aristotelian ideas in the respect that he regarded human beings as having a rational nature, most completely realized in intellectual perfection. The intellect in act is the actualization proper to a human being. Scripture and tradition are guides to attaining that actualization. They do not concern some other sort of truth or end.

5. Maimonides on the Limits of Knowledge

Maimonides’ negative theology is complemented by other elements of his epistemology. For example, he held that there are significant limitations on what human beings can demonstrate scientifically. We cannot, he thought, have demonstrative knowledge of astronomy though we can have demonstrable knowledge of sublunar physics. Recall that many ancient and medieval thinkers held that there is a real difference between the sublunar and supralunar realms. It was thought that the two realms are intelligible through different principles because the natures of the entities in them are different. Aristotle had held that, though the two realms are different, it is possible to have demonstrative knowledge of each of them.

Maimonides rejected this on the basis of empirical considerations, but the rejection had more than empirical implications. He argued that the motions of several celestial bodies were not in accord with what Aristotelian science held in regard to the motions of the spheres. If indeed there are exceptions to what should be necessities of physics, this shows that there are ‘particularities’ among heavenly phenomena, and that is evidence in favor of God as a creator who has made the heavens such as to show the particularities of the created order. In this way, what may look like an argument within physics is connected in a significant way with the dispute concerning whether the world is eternal and necessary or is the work of a creating God.

Maimonides accepted a great deal of Aristotle’s science, both in regard to its overall epistemology and in regard to many of its specific explanations. In Part II of the Guide Maimonides presented twenty-five postulates of Aristotelian physics, and he went on to argue for their indisputable role in scientific explanation. However, there were respects in which astronomy seemed problematic with regard to Aristotelian physics. The complex systems of motion developed to account for astronomical phenomena and the arrangement of celestial bodies could be shown to make mathematical sense but did not fully cohere with some substantive commitments of Aristotelian-Ptolemaic science. Chief among these is that mathematical astronomy did not consistently show that the earth is the fixed center of the celestial order. Maimonides thus distinguished between mathematical astronomy—which exhibited a systematic, if quite complex, order including eccentric spheres and epicycles—and physical reality, with particular features that cannot be demonstrated.

Overall, a number of scientific issues supplied a basis for Maimonides to claim that neither eternity nor creation is demonstrable. However, we are not forced into a suspension of judgment regarding the matter. As indicated above, there is another source of knowledge, namely, authentic tradition. This would seem very ad hoc and quite unconvincing if Maimonides did not develop a sophisticated conception of tradition as a source of knowledge. Earlier Jewish thinkers made important contributions to this issue. Saadia Gaon’s The Book of Belief and Opinions is especially important in this regard. What is striking about Maimonides’ approach is the manner in which it is related to other elements of his philosophy such as his negative theology.

Negative theology is a basis for an interpretation of Scripture, especially its anthropomorphisms, and is consistent with Maimonides’ conception of demonstrative science, prophecy understood in cognitive terms, and his intellectualist conception of human perfection. The negative theology enabled him to explain Scripture without being confined to literalism. Understanding of the text needs to cohere strongly with scientific and metaphysical—rational—understanding. That is what Maimonides tries to show. The oneness and incorporeality of God are truths of reason, and a sound interpretation of Scripture must preserve those truths. When Genesis (1:26) says that man is created in the likeness of God that does not mean that God has a body. Again, this is not to say that we have a complete comprehension of God, but metaphysical reasoning eliminates the hypothesis that God is a material being. Thus, what Genesis says should be interpreted to mean that man has a rational, indeed intellectual, form. This is a good illustration of how Maimonides interpreted Scripture as containing philosophical content in ways that may not be explicit but can be recognized and elaborated by human reason.

6. Philosophical Anthropology, Prophecy, and Perfection

The notion of the world as a created order and an order reflecting, in sometimes very complex, unobvious ways, divine goodness and wisdom is crucial for Maimonides. It is the foundation for the account of human nature, the human predicament, and the help that God gives to human beings. We can gain some additional insight into this by considering Maimonides’ interpretation of the Garden and of Adam and Eve eating of the tree of knowledge of good and evil after having been warned against doing so.

It is essential to Maimonides’ philosophical anthropology that human beings have an intellectual essence, a rational nature capable of comprehending intelligible features of reality. Again, to say that man is created in God’s image is to say that a human being has a rational soul. In Maimonides’ view Adam and Eve could have led untroubled lives guided exclusively by clear intellectual conceptions of the true and the false, without concern with good and evil. Such lives would have been free of frustration, pain, anxiety, and fear. All that was required was that Adam and Eve heed the injunction not to eat of the tree of the knowledge of good and evil. In eating of the tree they yielded to distraction from intellectual activity and sought satisfaction in the lesser objects of the imagination. Good and evil are not, in Maimonides’ view, demonstrable or intuited intelligibles. Our conceptions of good and evil involve the imagination.

In his treatment of Adam and Eve Maimonides is presenting key elements of his anthropology rather than exploring details of a particular episode of human history. His primary concern is to explicate basic features of human nature and the human condition and to make fundamental points about human intellectual capacities and the aspects of human nature as the basis of an ethical life. In the Guide Maimonides writes of Adam:

For the intellect that God made overflow unto man and that is the latter’s ultimate perfection, was that which Adam had been provided with before he disobeyed. It was because of this that it was said of him that that he was created in the image of God and in His likeness. It was likewise on account of it that he was addressed by God and given commandments, as it says: And the Lord God commanded, and so on (Guide, I, 2, p. 24).

In addition

Now man in virtue of his intellect knows truth from falsehood; and this holds good for all intelligible things. Accordingly when man was in his most perfect and excellent state, in accordance with his inborn disposition and possessed of his intellectual cognitions—because of which it is said of him: Thou has made him but little lower than Elohim—he had no faculty that was engaged in any way in the consideration of generally accepted things, and he did not apprehend them(Guide, I, 2, p. 25).

In failing to heed the warning not to eat of the tree of knowledge of good and evil, Adam “disobeyed the commandment that was imposed upon him on account of his intellect and, becoming endowed with the faculty of apprehending generally accepted things, he became absorbed in judging things to be bad or fine” (Guide, I, 2, p. 25). It is notable that the view that imagination can be a source of error and can lead us away from clear understanding has ancient roots. The ancient and medieval conceptions of how imagination compares unfavorably with intellect contrast sharply with many modern conceptions of the role and importance of imagination.

Adam’s and Eve’s error persists as a feature of our nature. Human beings are susceptible to distraction from the truth and from contemplation of the intelligible. We concern ourselves with other things and often with an urgency of desire. Maimonides did not interpret the story of Adam and Eve in the Garden in the way it is understood through the Christian notion of ‘The Fall’ or ‘Original Sin.’ According to Christianity only the supernatural agency of Christ, making a human reborn through the grace of Christ’s Passion, can restore the integrity of human nature. Judaism does not include such a conception. Maimonides held that God’s grace is exhibited through the giving of Torah, which is a guide to a virtuous and holy life, and by fulfilling the commandments through both understanding and action, a person can return to God, become close to God. This is explicable in terms of ethical and intellectual virtue without an additional supernatural agency. Judaism does not share the Christian conception of a profoundly wounded human nature, incapable of repairing itself. There is, though, a role for grace in Judaism; the giving of Torah reflects divine graciousness.

To Maimonides Adam’s and Eve’s sin of indulgence indicates that human beings can be distracted from truth. Human beings are creatures with passions and desires,  not only intellect. One epistemological implication of this anthropology is that moral judgments are non-demonstrable. Morality reflects the fact that human beings are not purely intellectual beings, something highlighted in Maimonides’ interpretation of the Garden.

Maimonides had a complex view of the rationality of the commandments and the relation between ethical virtue and intellectual virtue. Before going directly into that topic, it is important to comment on some key features of Maimonides’ conception of prophecy. His account of prophecy has deep connections with his metaphysics and epistemology. Maimonides conceptualized revelation and prophecy in rationalistic terms. He explicated prophecy as an emanation, ultimately from God, transmitted to human beings via the causality of the Agent Intellect. In Maimonides’ view there is no role for mystery in prophecy. Like Saadia before him, he did not regard Judaism as involving any fundamentally mysterious doctrines. Prophecy is understood in terms of emanation of intelligible form to an individual especially apt to receive it on account of their strength of rational and imaginative faculties.

The prophet has an ability to receive a more than ordinary extent of intellectual emanation. He also has an imagination of sufficient power to represent concretely what has been intellectually received. The chief point is that prophecy belongs on the same epistemological spectrum as other types of rational knowledge, such as science and metaphysics. In fact, Maimonides was a severe critic of many types of mysticism and was especially harsh in his objections to astrology. In part, that was because he thought that the determinism associated with astrology was in conflict with the compelling case for freedom of the will, an issue discussed below. Knowledge—understood as comprehension of intelligible forms—requires a causal agency to actualize it in an individual with the potentiality to acquire knowledge. The Agent Intellect actualizes knowledge in human beings. This is true in general and prophecy is, in principle, no different.

With respect to the emanation of intelligible form Maimonides held that if a person is such that only the person’s rational faculty is affected, then that is a speculative person. If the rational and imaginative faculties are affected, then that person is a prophet. If only the imagination is affected, the individual is a lawgiver. Imagination is crucial because of how it makes it possible to give concrete representation to intelligible knowledge, a representation by which the prophetic message is accessible to the great majority of people.

This element of Maimonides’ view is similar in some important respects to Alfarabi’s view. The prince needs wisdom and persuasive skill so that the great majority of people—who can be led by persuasion and compulsion but not by demonstration of the relevant truths—can be effectively led in a way that is oriented to the good. In Alfarabi’s view the ruler needs multiple virtues including theoretical virtue, deliberative virtue, moral virtue, and practical art. The ‘elect’ have knowledge that is demonstrated; they have an intellectual grasp of principles, and they can see what follows from them by necessity. They have rational understanding. The vulgar are reached by persuasion, and they have a grasp of things through imaginative representation rather than demonstration.

Maimonides’ view is, in a broad sense, a naturalistic conception of prophecy. The connection between the prophet and the Agent Intellect is not made by an act of God; God can block prophecy but an individual meets the conditions for prophecy on epistemological terms, so to speak, not through divine intervention. In Maimonides’ view the prophet does not have a mysterious experience or an extraordinary faculty. Still, to be effective as a prophet, the person must also be able to apply their higher understanding effectively and that involves the kind of concrete detail that can only come from imagination.In discussing prophecy Maimonides presented three main positions on the issue. They are:

  1. God can make anyone a prophet. (This is the vulgar view.)
  2. Prophecy is a perfection involving the height of intellectual, imaginative capacities, and moral character. (This is the philosophical view.)
  3. Prophecy is as the philosophical view maintains, but God, through performance of a miracle, can prevent a suitably virtuous person from becoming a prophet. (This, Maimonides says, is the Jewish view.)

No one lacking virtue can be a prophet. Only a person with the relevant perfections will become a prophet; however, because the performance of divine miracles is possible, God can prevent even a person with the relevant perfections from becoming a prophet. Because Maimonides acknowledges the possibility of miracles, he allows that God can prevent prophecy. Overall, this is a naturalistic conception, though it is couched in language suitable to non-philosophical persons’ beliefs in the importance of miracles.

Also, it should be noted that there is one exception to the typology above. Maimonides held that in Moses’ case, prophecy was entirely intellectual. Moses was capable of a uniquely complete comprehension of intelligibles.

Maimonides’ philosophy shows the influence of Aristotle, Islamic commentaries on Aristotle, kalam, and Neoplatonism. Aristotelianism and Neoplatonism intersect in his view that the further away from the ground and source of being—the further from God in the created order—the less perfect are beings and the more susceptible they are to degeneration, change, and ceasing to be. The more fully a human being actualizes the intellect, the more like God that individual becomes inasmuch as actuated intellect has no tendency to corruption or change. A human being whose intellect is actualized as fully as possible is able to come closer to God. That striving involves the exercise of ethical virtue and intellectual virtue. This is an intellectualized conception of imitatio dei. The created order is a series of levels of reality, each more remote from and less like the ground and source of being, but human beings are capable of being close to God through understanding.

Maimonides says of man that “[h]is ultimate perfection is to become rational in actu, I mean to have an intellect in actu” (Guide, III, 27, p. 511). In addition, , “[i]t is clear that to this ultimate perfection there do not belong either actions or moral qualities and that it consists only of opinions toward which speculation has led and that investigation has rendered compulsory” (Guide, III, 27, p. 511).

The more one’s intellect is actualized, the more one is protected by providence in the metaphysical sense that one is less liable to corruption and ceasing to be. In short, Maimonides held that a person is immortal, capable of surviving bodily death, to the extent that one’s intellect is actualized. There are then, degrees of immortality and degrees of being protected by providence. Prophecy, providence, and immortality are all explicated along these Aristotelian/Neoplatonic lines.

Maimonides was criticized for not clearly and emphatically asserting that resurrection of the dead is a fundamental principle of Judaism. It was really not until the medieval era and the deadly pressures on Jews caught between Islam and Christianity during the Crusades that Jewish thinkers formulated a dogma for Judaism. The formulation of dogma could be helpful to Jews pressured to defend their religion and needing to have ready replies to theological attacks on it. Maimonides formulated Thirteen Fundamental Principles of Jewish Faith, the last of which is belief that the dead will be brought back to life when God wills it. Apart from a small number of passages in the Prophets, the resurrection of the dead does not figure in the Hebrew Bible. Nevertheless, by the thirteenth century it was becoming a more accepted, shared element of Judaism, and Maimonides included it among his Thirteen Principles. The doctrine is in tension with the intellectualistic Aristotelianism of Maimonides’ anthropology, and scholarly debate over whether he genuinely accepted the doctrine continues.

A significant respect in which his anthropology differs from Aristotle’s is connected with creation, revelation, and redemption. Aristotle’s Metaphysics opens with “All men by nature desire to know.” This is not an ordinary empirical claim; it states something Aristotle took to be fundamental to human nature, namely, that our telosis intellectual. A human being’s nature is most completely realized in intellectual activity, and multiple features of human nature are to be understood in terms of how they are related to that telos. Thus far, the agreement between Aristotle and Maimonides is quite close.

However, for Aristotle, a human being’s most fundamental orientation to the world is wonder. That reflects our telos, and it is motivationally important to the activities through which our telos can be realized. Maimonides would agree that wonder is a basic feature of our rational nature but, given the fact of creation and revelation and God’s justice and mercy, it can be said that a human being’s most basic orientation to reality is gratitude or a combination of gratitude and humility. This is because gratitude is owed to God for the very existence of the world and for the wisdom of the created order. Our highest end is a loving cognition of God. The fact that human beings have been given aid through revelation of Torah reshapes the Aristotelian conception of both human beings and the world overall. Creation, revelation, and redemption are not just ‘accessories’ to what is otherwise an unchanged Aristotelian philosophy. Gratitude includes an aspiration to holiness, a resolve to fulfill the commandments so that one imitates God, to the extent possible for a human being, through attaining understanding and acting in ways informed by understanding.

Humility has a place in a person’s fundamental orientation at least in the respect that perhaps the most compelling and evident conception a person can have is the conception of all things being dependent upon God. Even in striving for virtue and perfection of one’s nature through one’s own voluntary activity, humility is appropriate because of the contrast between human beings and God and because of the divine graciousness in giving help to human beings via revelation. We will see below, in the discussion of ethics, how Maimonides’ view of pride and humility is strikingly different from Aristotle’s.

Given the central role of the commandments in regard to human perfection, we are in position now to address some of the specific features of Maimonides’ conception of the relation between the ethical and the intellectual and how they are mutually reinforcing.

7. Maimonides on Ethical and Intellectual Virtue

As a pathway into Maimonides’ account of the virtues, it will be helpful to begin with the issue of ‘the reasons for the commandments’ (t’amei ha-mitzvot). While there is some disagreement over the precise number of commandments in Torah, Maimonides concurred with the most widely shared view, holding that they number six hundred thirteen. (Three hundred sixty-five are prohibitions and two hundred forty-eight are positive injunctions.) Along with some other medieval Jewish philosophers Maimonides held that fulfilling the commandments is not only a matter of practice but also study. Jews are to enlarge and deepen their understanding by striving to comprehend the reasons for the commandments, which is itself commanded. Jewish thinkers often quoted Deuteronomy as a locus of the commandment to seek understanding by reflecting upon the rational justifications of the commandments.  For example, Deuteronomy 4, 5-8, reads, ‘for this is your wisdom and your understanding in the sight of the peoples, that, when they hear all these statutes, shall say: “Surely this great nation is a wise and understanding people.”’

Maimonides held that there are reasons for all of the commandments. None is simply an arbitrary test of obedience. Moreover, he thought it an offense against divine wisdom that any commandment should be without reason. Some philosophers of the period argued for divine voluntarism, often as a way of preserving God’s sovereignty and power. Voluntarism had numerous highly influential Islamic proponents, but very few Jewish philosophers endorsed it. Scotus and Ockham are often described as propounding divine voluntarism, though their views are complex in ways that the ‘voluntarist’ label does not accurately apply.

Numerous Jewish thinkers distinguished between mishpatim and hukkim, that is, between judgments and statutes. The former are those commandments the reasons for which are ascertainable by human beings, and the latter are those commandments whose justifications are more opaque but, in the view of some, still rational. Saadia had distinguished between ‘laws of reason’ and ‘laws of revelation’ as a way of making the distinction. There was debate over whether some mishpatim (judgments) are fully evident to reason. Saadia held that view; Maimonides did not. Saadia’s view was very much like an intuitionist view regarding at least some of the commandments. The chief point here is that, in Maimonides’ view, all commandments are supported by rational justification, though none are rationally self-evident.

He wrote:

[E]very commandment from among these six hundred and thirteen commandments exists either with a view to communicating a correct opinion, or to putting an end to an unhealthy opinion, or to communicating a rule of justice, or to warding off an injustice, or to endowing men with a noble moral quality, or to warning them against an evil moral quality. Thus all [the commandments] are bound up with three things: opinions, moral qualities, and political civic actions (Guide, III, 31, p. 524).

He criticized voluntarism harshly, calling it a “sickness” of soul to think that lacking any rational purpose should be a mark that a law has a divine origin. Maimonides wrote, “It is, however, the doctrine of all of us—both of the multitude and of the elite—that all the Laws have a cause, though we ignore the causes for some of them and we do not know the manner in which they conform to wisdom” (Guide, III, 26, p. 507). In the midst of a discussion of the matter (chapter 31 of the Guide) he quotes the passage from Deuteronomy 4.  The ultimate, overall purpose “of the Law as a whole is to put an end to idolatry” (Guide, III, 29, p. 517). The purpose is realized through individuals acquiring good moral habits, seeking and preserving justice, and attaining understanding. Radical voluntarism would leave the commandments without purpose or point, when we can see that “all the commandments are bound up with three things: opinions, moral qualities, and political civic actions” (Guide, III, 31, p. 524). Sometimes he reduces the purpose of the Law overall to two ends, “the welfare of the soul and the welfare of the body” (Guide, III, 27, p. 510).


Maimonides held that fulfilling the commandments could help a person attain more understanding of the reasons for the commandments. He developed a complex, subtle view of the relations between ethical and intellectual virtue while endorsing an intellectualist conception of human perfection. He held that the more fully one understands the rational justifications for the commandments, the more one will be motivated to fulfill them. The motivation is increased by appreciation of the commandments’ wisdom. Thus, it is also part of his view that tradition is important not just as a way of sustaining ancient practices but also as transmitting understanding that can be enlarged and deepened.  There are several respects in which Maimonides’ thought has rationalistic tendencies, and this point about tradition as having authority because of its relation to reason and not just the authority of antiquity is a good example.

Maimonides did not acknowledge an intellectual virtue of practical wisdom. One important difference between Maimonides and Aristotle is that Maimonides regarded all virtues, apart from intellectual virtue, as choiceworthy only because they serve intellectual virtue. Preserving health and wellbeing and composing the soul are conditions for intellectual perfection. The virtues, other than intellectual virtue, are not in Maimonides’s view choice-worthy in their own right, independent of their relation to intellectual virtue. As David Shatz writes of Maimonides’ view:

His writings contain extensive discussion of ridding oneself of bad ethical traits and acquiring good ones, and of the attempt to “quell the impulses” of matter that distract people from intellectual pursuits and impede cognition of what is not physical. The quelling of such impulses is associated with the attainment of holiness (GP 3.8, 3.33). Morality is a preparation for contemplation and constitutes no trivial task (Shatz, p. 169).

In Chapter 54, which is the final chapter of the Guide, Maimonides distinguishes four species of perfection relevant to human beings. They are “the perfection of possessions” (material goods and resources), “the perfection of bodily constitution and shape” (such things as corporeal strength and temperament, which “[do] not belong to man qua man, but qua animal”), “the perfection of the moral virtues” (which he says is “preparation for something else and not an end in itself”), and finally, intellectual perfection, “[t]he true human perfection; it consists in the acquisition of the rational virtues… [T]hrough it man is man” (Guide, III, 54, p. 635).

The first three species of human virtue are conditions for the fourth species, which is the virtue by which one’s essence is actualized. Health, strength, and at least a modicum of material means are needed in order to engage in morally virtuous activity. The moral virtues are conditions for the composure and focus of mind required for intellectual virtue. Intellectual virtue is the individual’s true perfection, and it brings with it enduring permanence without corruption. Yet soon after making the pronounced case for human perfection as intellectual perfection, Maimonides concludes the Guide with a statement about how we imitate God to the fullest through loving-kindness, righteousness, and judgment. Unsurprisingly, there is considerable debate among scholars regarding just how Maimonides’ view is to be interpreted. One way to understand his view is that the first three perfections are choiceworthy as conditions and support for intellectual perfection, and to the extent to which one attains intellectual perfection, it will inform and be reflected in how one acts, and the activity mentioned at the conclusion of the Guide is imitation of God insofar as it is care for the created order, and finally, care is inseparable from the understanding of that order. In this view, the first three perfections of a human being are necessary for intellectual perfection, but intellectual perfection is then itself actualized in ethically excellent human action.

This may still seem to be problematically related to Maimonides’ statements about intellectual perfection as the distinctive and highest perfection of a human being. However, it suggests a way in which that notion of perfection can be in agreement with the significance Maimonides attaches to imitatio dei. In any case, the issue is an excellent example of the complexity of Maimonides’ thought and the subtlety and care with which he articulated it. His complex view cannot be dismissed as a clumsy lapse in consistency or the effect of inattention to what he said elsewhere.

Yet the Guide is also the work in which Maimonides explains Job’s suffering on the basis of the fact that, while Job was ethically virtuous, he was not said to excel in intellectual virtue. His imperfect understanding was at the root of Job’s perplexity over what befell him. If he had more perfect understanding, he would have understood that all is ordered for the best by divine providence. Maimonides connected intellectual virtue with providence in just that way; the more perfect one’s understanding, the more complete one’s protection from evil. Human beings mistakenly think that God’s knowledge is like our knowledge and that God’s purposes are like our own. That is, on our part, the error of displacing intellect with our imagination.

If man knows this, every misfortune will be borne lightly by him. And misfortunes will not add to his doubts regarding the deity and whether He does or does not know and whether He exercises providence or manifests neglect, but will, on the contrary, add to his love, as is said in the conclusion of the prophetic revelation in question: Wherefore I abhor myself, and repent of dust and ashes (Guide, III, 23, p. 497).

It is also a crucial part of Maimonides’ view of intellectual perfection that the love of God “is proportionate to apprehension” (Guide, III, 51, p. 621). The intellect emanating from God is the “bond” between God and human beings and “You have the choice: if you wish to strengthen and fortify this bond, you can do so; if, however, you wish gradually to make it weaker and feebler until you cut it, you can also do that” (Guide, III, 51, p. 621). Happiness is ultimately and essentially intellectual, even if in the aspiration to be holy and to imitate God, we act in the world in ways we understand to be God’s ways.

8. Some Key Elements of Moral Epistemology and Moral Psychology

The Law supplies the guidance for virtuous activity. We need to be careful in regard to this point. It is not Maimonides’ view that a person is to follow the law mechanically or without reflection or criticism. We saw above the central importance of seeking to enlarge and deepen understanding of the commandments. That involves questioning, dialectic, elaboration, and extending judgment to new sorts of cases. Thus, even though Maimonides’ ethics lacks a virtue of practical wisdom, reason and reasoning had a vital, extensive role in it.

Recall, also, that Maimonides held that good and evil relate to the imagination rather than the intellect. Again, it is important to be careful; this does not mean that Maimonides thought that good and evil are subjective or that there is no objective difference between being correct and being mistaken about them. He did not think that good and evil were objects of the intellect, but he did think that judgments of good and evil could be, or could fail to be, supported by reasons. The key contrast here is not between the rational and the conventional, or subjective, but between the demonstrable and the not demonstrable. Judgments of good and evil are not demonstrable but neither are they conventional. It is in the sciences that demonstration is possible, but that does not relegate ethical judgment to the sphere of the merely conventional, expressive, or subjective.

We can attain further clarity concerning this matter by considering Maimonides’ use of, what is translated as, the “generally accepted.” Maimonides uses the notion of the “generally accepted” in a number of places in the Guide. (See, for example, I, 2; also III, 29; III, 31; III, 32; and in “Eight Chapters,” Ch. VIII, p. 87) He seems to use it in two ways. In one sense, “generally accepted” refers to beliefs and practices widely held, whether or not they are true or supported by good reasons. For example, we might say that in ancient times it was generally accepted that the stars exercised causal power over the actions of human beings, causing them to do what they do (a view Maimonides opposed). That is a belief that was widely held, though it was false.

In the second sense, something may be said to be generally accepted insofar as it is widely held on the basis of good reasons, though not demonstrable. The matter in question is not known by intuition or demonstration, yet neither is it simply a matter of custom or longstanding convention. There are grounds for it such that it is a reasonable thing to maintain. Moral beliefs are generally accepted in that second sense. Thus, some of what is generally accepted God wishes to efface from our minds, as is the case with idolatrous beliefs, while some of what is generally accepted is important for us to believe and to employ as a basis for action. What is generally accepted, in this sense, is not merely a matter of being commonly believed. It is a matter of being a justified though non-demonstrable belief.

Above we noted that, according to Maimonides, there are reasons for all of the commandments. The reasons for them are not always evident, and in many cases, when we seek after them, will find that their justification remains elusive. For instance, we may be able to see that there is reason to punish certain kinds of conduct; it may be easily understood that certain action-types count as crimes or offenses. It may not be clear why the punishment is forty lashes rather than thirty-nine or forty-one. Perhaps we agree that sixty would be too many and ten would be too few. But why does the commandment tell us forty? In such cases Maimonides tells us that some number had to be chosen so that there would be clarity about what is required, and God had a reason for the degree of severity of the punishment even if it is not rationally evident that it must be forty. In some cases, even God simply has to make a choice within a range determined by his wisdom.

There is an important connection between this issue and the earlier discussion of the reasons for the commandments. Many of the statutes (hukkim) concern ritual, diet, the clean and the unclean, matters of dress, and a great many practices, some of which do not seem to have any easily discernible ethical significance. Maimonides argued that part of the explanation for some of them is that they were needed to orient the Israelites to proper worship of God when they were accustomed to the practices of the pagan peoples surrounding them. Part of the divine wisdom of the commandments is that they did not require a complete, abrupt change in practice, a change so radical that people would have resisted it on account of having no grasp of what they were being required to do. Instead, in a manner reflective of God’s “gracious ruse,” many of the commandments required sacrifice and other practices with which the Israelites were familiar. However, the Law overall, as an integrated, purposeful discipline of perfection, guided people to true belief and genuinely virtuous practice.

On the issue of why the commandments contain many requirements not so different from the practices of people from whom the Israelites were to be distinguished by their covenant with God, Maimonides wrote:

For a sudden transition from one opposite to another is impossible. And therefore man, according to his nature, is not capable of abandoning suddenly all to which he was accustomed. As therefore God sent Moses our Master to make out of us a kingdom of priests and a holy nation—through the knowledge of Him, may He be exalted, according to what he has explained” (Guide, III, 32, p. 526).

Recognizable practices oriented to a new purpose and having new meaning were required.

His wisdom, may He be exalted, and His gracious ruse, which is manifest in regard to all His creatures, did not require that He give us a Law prescribing the rejection, abandonment, and abolition of all these kinds of worship. For one could not then conceive the acceptance of [such a Law], considering the nature of man, which always likes that to which it is accustomed” (Guide, III, 32, p. 526).

This way the people would not reject what was being asked of them as alien and inscrutable. Maimonides, like Aristotle, regarded human beings as creatures of habit in very significant respects. This is one of the respects in which Aristotelian elements of philosophical anthropology and moral psychology are discernible in Maimonides.

These points are also relevant to Maimonides’ treatment of messianism. He argued that when the Messiah reigns there will be no fundamental change in human nature. The world will not be reordered except that it will be a time of universal peace. Israel will have political sovereignty restored to it, and peoples all over the world will engage in study, seeking scientific and philosophical understanding. The ways of the world will not be altered in any fundamental respect except that during the messianic era people will attain and exercise virtue. Moreover, fulfilling the commandments is necessary preparation for that. People need to prepare themselves for rule by the Messiah; until that preparation is done, messianic claims should be severely tested.

Habits and the importance of habituation figure prominently in “Eight Chapters” (Commentary on the Mishnah) and also in “Laws Concerning Character Traits,” (Mishneh Torah). “Eight Chapters” presents much of Maimonides’ moral psychology and the main claims in his conception of free will. In it we find very Aristotelian-sounding philosophical idioms being put to work in the service of some quite un-Aristotelian themes and theses. That the commandments are to be fulfilled has implications for the conception of free will and for the possibility of repentance and character change, and of course, there are many implications for what a human being needs to do in order to realize the perfection proper to humans. Maimonides’ conception of the virtues differs from Aristotle’s in some striking ways, though Maimonides still owes a great deal to Aristotle in respect to the conceptual architecture of virtue.

Like Aristotle, Maimonides emphasized the importance of regular practice, in contrast to any particular episode of decision, in acquiring a virtue. Like Aristotle, he understood virtues and vices as ethically and explanatorily significant states of character. Like Aristotle, he took many virtues to lie in a mean. “The general rule is that he follow the mean for every single character trait, until all his character traits are ordered according to the mean. That is in keeping with what Solomon says: ‘And all your ways will be upright’” (Maimonides, “Laws Concerning Character Traits,” in Ethical Writings of Maimonidess, p. 33).

In addition, Maimonides agreed that there is a vital role for excellent examples, persons of sound judgment and well-ordered dispositions of desire and affect. “It is a positive commandment to cleave to the wise men in order to learn from their actions” (“Laws Concerning Character Traits,” p. 47). Such persons can be important models, shaping the aspirations of others. When one suffers a sickness of the soul, he is to “go to the wise men—who are physicians of the soul—and they will cure their disease by means of the character traits that they shall teach them, until they make them return to the middle way” (“Laws Concerning Character Traits,” p. 31).

Like Aristotle, Maimonides recognizes the significance of the overall character of one’s community and the people by whom one is surrounded. Notwithstanding those and other important points of agreement, Maimonides’ ethics and his account of moral psychology include some elements very different from Aristotle’s views. The differences concern some fundamental, general features of moral psychology as well as the understanding of individual virtues and vices.

With regard to particular virtues Maimonides held that anger and pride are two aspects of our moral psychology that we should do our utmost to minimize. He goes so far as to say that a truly virtuous man will put on a show of anger—because it may be necessary as part of the project of habituating one’s children or making important ethical points to others—while not actually feeling anger. He regarded anger as quite threatening to composure of mind and to attention to God as one’s proper focus. In actually feeling anger the individual is disturbed and is taken over by passion in a way that can misguide judgment and action. That is to be avoided as completely as possible, even when it is appropriate to punish for example.

Because prophecy is ultimately an intellectual phenomenon, one cannot be a prophet if one’s passions are disturbed. Anger and sadness, for example, are impediments to prophecy. In “Laws Concerning Character Traits” Maimonides writes, “the wise men of old said: ‘Anyone who is angry—it is as if he worships idols.’ They said about anyone who is angry: If he is a wise man, his wisdom departs from him, and if he is a prophet, his prophecy departs from him” (“Laws Concerning Character Traits” p. 32). Distractions from intellectual focus and composure are impediments to prophecy.

Pride is another element of moral psychology without proper place in the virtuous person’s character. First of all, we are to be humble before God. We mentioned above the significance of awareness of our finiteness and smallness in contrast to God, and there is also the fact of the radical dependence of all things on God. Scripture says that Moses, the greatest prophet and the leader of the Israelites on their way to becoming a people through his leadership, was very humble. Thus, the sort of humility urged is not inconsistent with courage, resolve, excellent judgment, and the willingness to accept weighty responsibility. Humility concerns restraint of the ego, restraint of self-love in order to remain mindful of the needs and the welfare of others, and guarding against an inflated opinion of oneself and one’s own interests. Torah enjoins again and again to welcome the stranger, to care for the widow, the orphan, and the needy, and for the Israelites not to forget that they were once slaves in Egypt. Humility is a way of registering dependence, showing gratitude for existence and for being sustained, and appreciating the gift of Torah.

Pride and anger are two notable cases regarding which one is to aim for an extreme rather than the mean. “In the case of some character traits, a man is forbidden to accustom himself to the mean. Rather, he shall move to the other extreme. One such [character trait] is a haughty heart, for the good way is not that a man be merely humble, but that he have a lowly spirit, that his spirit be very submissive.”(“Laws Concerning Character Traits,” p. 31)

Every man whose character traits all lie in the mean is called a wise man. Whoever is exceedingly scrupulous with himself and moves a little toward one side or the other, away from the character trait in the mean, is called a pious man. Whoever moves away from a haughty heart to the opposite extreme so that he is exceedingly lowly in spirit is a called a pious man. This is the measure of piety. If he moves only to the mean and is humble, he is called a wise man; this is the measure of wisdom(“Laws Concerning Character Traits,” pp. 29-30).

In general, Maimonides held that the commandments give human beings the discipline to acquire dispositions lying in the mean. “We are commanded to walk in these middle ways, which are the good and right ways. As it is said: ‘And you shall walk in His ways’” (“Laws Concerning Character Traits,” p. 30). He referred to the middle way as “the way of the Lord” (“Laws Concerning Character Traits,” p. 30). Thus, “[t]he Law forbids what it forbids and commands what it commands only for this reason, i.e., that we move away from one side as a means of discipline” (Maimonides, “Eight Chapters,” p. 71). He did, though, include the category of the pious in addition to the wise, noting the appropriateness of certain extremes to the pious.

Maimonides did not encourage severe asceticism and self-punishment. Like many other Jewish thinkers he held that the discipline of the commandments was discipline enough, “Therefore the wise men commanded that a man only abstain from things forbidden by the Torah” (“Eight Chapters,” p. 34). Quoting the sages, he asks, “‘Is what Torah has prohibited not enough for you, that you prohibit other things for yourself?’” (“Eight Chapters,” p. 34).

Maimonides made an important moral-psychological distinction between fulfilling the commandments that concern matters ascertainable by human reason, the things “generally accepted,” and those concerning matters of the “traditional laws,” that is, the hukkim. Those are what Saadia called “the laws of revelation” in contrast to “the laws of reason.” In regard to what is generally accepted, he quotes Talmud, writing, “If they were not written down, they would deserve to be written down.” (“Eight Chapters,” p. 80) The traditional laws make a different sort of demand on inclination and desire. They specify prohibitions that would not, just on the basis of what reason generally accepts, be arrived at. For that reason, there is greater virtue in fulfilling those commandments when it is a struggle to do so, while the person who is temperate with regard to what reason requires is better than the person who struggles to fulfill those commandments. With regard to murder, theft, fraud, repaying a benefactor with evil rather than gratitude, and so forth, it is better to have no desire to do what is prohibited.

With regard to the dietary laws, ritual laws, and so forth, there is greater virtue in successfully battling an inclination to do what is prohibited than in simply having no such desire. Thus, in the case of one type of commandment, virtue is superior to continence; in the case of the other type of commandment, continence, in the face of struggling against desire, is superior. This was Maimonides’ method of resolving what appeared to be a contradiction between what ‘the philosophers’ say and what ‘the sages’ say. It is, he asserts, “a marvelous subtlety and a wonderful reconciliation of the two views” (“Eight Chapters,” p. 80). This approach acknowledges the special difficulty involved with the ritual laws and commandments unique to the Jewish people. Maimonides saw that it would be unreasonable to expect people to be able to fulfill those on the basis of natural tendencies. One might have a natural disposition to be kind and compassionate, but no one has a natural disposition to fulfill say, the laws concerning specific practices associated with holy days, diet or sacrifices of specific types.

9. Freedom of the Will, Repentance, and Covenant

Two issues regarding which Maimonides’ views departed significantly from Aristotle’s are freedom of the will and repentance. Both are related in a significant respect. Repentance, as Maimonides understood it, is possible only if persons have free will and Maimonides insisted that the Law and the commandments would be pointless without freedom of the will:

If man’s actions were done under compulsion, the commandments and prohibitions of the Law would be nullified and they would all be absolutely in vain, since man would have no choice in what he does. Similarly, instruction and education, including instruction in all the productive arts, would necessarily be in vain an would all be futile (“Eight Chapters,” pp. 84-5).

He maintained that “[r]eward and punishment would also be sheer injustice, not be be [sic] meted out by some of us to others nor by God to us (“Eight Chapters,” p. 85).

There is no question that humans have free will. “The truth about which there is no doubt at all is that all of man’s actions are given over to him (“Eight Chapters,” p. 85). This is a robust version of ‘ought implies can,’ such that God’s wisdom and justice are at stake. The notion that a human being might lack freedom of the will is simply unsupportable, and Maimonides’ argument concerning the Law has a result that comports with his critique of astrological determinism.

Moreover, despite the weight he put on the importance of habits in shaping a person’s character and in the acquisition of virtues and vices, Maimonides also argued that even a mature individual is able to change his character through repentance. The regularly virtuous person is still able to sin, and the regularly vicious person is able to ethically reorient himself, connecting with the good through changing his dispositions and following the commandments.

Aristotle held that through the process of habituation, including how one habituates oneself, a person acquires a second nature, a developed character, which becomes fixed or very nearly fixed. The plasticity of one’s capacities is largely exhausted as a result of exercising them in specific ways such that certain specific states of character are formed. That’s just what it is to have a character. This does not mean that a person must be either soundly virtuous or profoundly vicious. Most people are continent rather than temperate, and they may never cease to struggle to some extent to do what virtue requires. In Aristotle’s view the chief point is that, whatever the extent of one’s virtues or vices, the individual is very likely to reach a condition in which states of character are firmly established. In having a character, one has dispositions of desire and emotion and engages in patterns and policies of reasoning in quite regular ways. In Aristotle’s view it would not be reasonable to expect of people in general that they should be able to change their mature characters.

Aristotle (especially in the Rhetoric) discusses certain characteristic features of persons at different stages in life—how young men differ from men late in life, and so forth. Still, his view was that one’s second nature, one’s ethically relevant dispositions to choose, to act, and to respond, tends to be stable rather than easily changed. The dispositions into which a person settles shape the person’s judgments, awareness, and deliberations. It is not as though there is rational agency and separate from that are elements of character. One’s character just is the form that one’s rational agency takes on account of how specific dispositions are reflected in one’s choices, actions, and responses. In this view the person established in vice may not even be able to recognize what virtue requires. After all, that person is settled in a (wrong) conception of what is worthwhile and desirable and may see no reason to revise that conception.  Even supposing that recognition of what virtue requires is possible, the vicious person may not have any effective desire to change.

For Maimonides it was crucial that a significant revision of a person’s dispositions is possible. That is a necessary condition of genuine repentance, which is something Maimonides held is never practically impossible. Even the person established in profound vices and enjoying vicious activities, can come to see what virtue requires and can achieve ethical reorientation.  It should be noted that there are a few instances in the Hebrew Bible in which God prevents a person from repenting and makes it impossible for that agent to do the right thing. The ‘hardening of Pharaoh’s heart’ just before the exodus from Egypt is a notable example. The difficulty of interpreting the morality of such a case made it a fixture of medieval Jewish philosophy. Maimonides addresses the instance explicitly. There is not space here to discuss it in depth. It is indeed a hard case but that is because it is at odds with another view that he held, namely, that people have freedom of the will adequate to repent genuinely.

The Law has a crucial role in helping people to achieve ethical reorientation. First, the Law supplies accessible guidance. Even if the people by whom one is surrounded are poor examples, an individual is not utterly cut off from direction and guidance concerning virtue. The Law provides accessible guidance in a way that is not part of Aristotle’s view. If there are no persons around with practical wisdom, an Aristotelian agent may not be able to ascertain what is virtuous and good. The guidance of actual exemplars is likely to be vitally important to the cultivation and encouragement of virtue given Aristotle’s moral psychology. Maimonides also thought that exemplars and the prevailing norms of the community are crucial. However, the Law provides a measure for who is to count as an exemplar. Its guidance is accessible in a way for which there is no counterpart in Aristotle’s ethical view. In “Laws of Repentance” Maimonides writes, “If one desires to turn towards the good way and be righteous, he has the power to do” (Maimonides, “Laws of Repentance,” V, 1). He says, “Every person turns to the way which he desires, spontaneously and of his own volition” (“Laws of Repentance,” V, 2). In the Guide Maimonides writes, “If then the individual believed that this fracture [the tendency to sin] can never be remedied, he would persist in his error and sometimes perhaps disobey even more because of the fact that no stratagem remains at his disposal” (Guide, III, 36, p. 540).

The Law also includes guidance regarding the practices through which repentance is possible. It shows persons what is involved in the effort to re-orient oneself to virtue. Repentance is not simply a matter of decision. It requires certain kinds of recognition, reflective self-knowledge, knowledge of what is really good, not only apparently good, and knowledge of the practices required to re-turn to God and to attain virtue. Maimonides acknowledged the ‘inertia,’ so to speak, of second nature, while also holding that a person can radically redirect volition. There are many commandments concerning repentance. Thus, the agent who is genuinely motivated to make the effort can know what is needed in order to make an effective effort.

This more libertarian conception of free will, at least in contrast to Aristotle, is connected with moral epistemology and important issues in moral psychology. The ‘ought’ of the commandments implies that we can do what is required, and in order to do what is required, we need to know what is required. In fact, the notion that what the Law requires is not too hard for human beings to grasp is an important principle in Jewish thought. Maimonides agreed with Aristotle in regard to each person being born with a certain temperament and having specific propensities and susceptibilities through no choice or fault of one’s own. However, Maimonides had a more optimistic conception of the depth of change one can bring about in one’s character, made possible by and through fulfilling the commandments.

In Aristotle’s view, happiness is attainable by a human being if the individual is fortunate with respect to external conditions and with respect to habituation by others, and if one habituates oneself in a sound manner. The core of happiness depends upon the self-determined agency of the individual but certain external conditions are also required. For some, something like the happiness of the gods may even be attainable. However, in Aristotle’s view there is not a notion of redemption or providential history as there is in the Abrahamic faith-traditions. There is, however, something like blessedness—the favor of the gods—but it is not a clear counterpart to monotheistic providence. In Judaism, providence and redemption are closely connected with the notion of covenant. Through the covenant they have an enduring relation with God, to whom they answer for their sins and by whom their virtue is to be rewarded.

Many related topics, such as repentance, worship, the aspiration to be holy, and responsibilities with respect to other members of the national community are to be understood through their connections with covenant. Like Aristotle, Maimonides attached considerable importance to the community in which one lives and the ways in which the public, social world can influence character:

A disciple of wise men is not permitted to live in any city that does not have these ten things: a physician, a surgeon, a bathhouse, a bathroom, a fixed source of water such as a river or spring, a synagogue, a teacher of children, a scribe, a collector of charity, and a court that can punish with lashes and imprisonment (“Laws Concerning Character Traits,” p. 41).

These are all needed in order for a person to live well. In addition, “It is a positive commandment to cleave to the wise men in order to learn from their actions” (“Laws Concerning Character Traits,” p. 47). This emphasis on the community is connected with covenant inasmuch as the commandments are a comprehensive guide to life and not just ethical guidance or guidance for worship. Jewish law extends to all sorts of aspects of life, and there are not clear, systematic distinctions between criminal law and torts or between law and religion or ethics and religious life.

The Talmud, which is the written version of the Oral Law, covers everything from agricultural practice, to marriage, to tithing, to criminal procedure and sentences, to contracts, forgiveness, sexuality, and so forth. Some commandments could not be fulfilled because of the destruction of the Temple and the lack of a self-determining political entity. But Maimonides did not therefore maintain that those portions of the Law were irrelevant or ceased to be integral. Rather, they would have to wait upon the restoration of the Temple.

We noted above that Maimonides had an intellectualist conception of human nature. In the final chapters of the Guide he emphasizes this and claims, “Thus it is clear that after apprehension, total devotion to Him and the employment of intellectual thought in constantly loving Him should be aimed at. Mostly this is achieved in solitude and isolation. Hence every excellent man stays frequently in solitude and does not meet anyone unless it is necessary” (Guide, III, 51, p. 621). In “Laws Concerning Character Traits” Maimonides indicates several respects in which a man should be preoccupied with thought of God, even to the extent of feigning attention to more mundane matters. This is not because it is perfectly all right to ignore one’s spouse or children or neighbors but, rather, because this is how a person guards against pride and distraction from the true and the good. Indulging in gossip, bearing a grudge, idol worship, and illicit sexual union are all examples of how one can be led down a bad path of aroused passions and desires, harming oneself and others. Accordingly, “[i]t is proper for a man to overlook all things of the world, for according to those who understand, everything is vain and empty and not worth taking vengeance for” (“Laws Concerning Character Traits,” p. 52).

10. The Issue of Esotericism


The question of the relation between philosophy and revealed religion in Maimonides’ thought has motivated considerable debate. The chief point of dispute is whether Maimonides actually held that the claims of revealed religion are untenable and that his works deliberately disguise his true convictions, namely that the claims of reason leave no place for revealed religion. Thus, advocates of the view maintain that there is a deep political purpose to a work such as the Guide; it supports the claims of revealed religion and its tradition by appearance only in order not to undermine and demoralize the many Jews for whom fidelity to the tradition shaped their world and their lives. Critics of the case for Maimonidean esotericism agree that Maimonides’ views are complex, involve apparent contradictions, and that he presents part of a line of reasoning in one place and other parts in other places without clear signals, especially in the Guide. However, they argue that there is a consistent, undisguised theme of explicating religion in philosophical terms because of his genuine commitment to philosophy and tradition.

Maimonides’ thought aroused controversy during and after his life, and it has influenced important philosophers in diverse ways. It is a rationalistic understanding of Judaism and at the same time it ascribes fundamental importance to tradition. It includes many distinctively medieval elements and aspects, yet it manages to remain relevant through the ways it formulates and addresses some of the most fundamental questions concerning philosophy, religion, and the relations between them.

11. Conclusion


Maimonides’ negative theology and the rationalistic valence of his thought influenced Aquinas, and later, Leibniz and Spinoza. Maimonides and Spinoza are similar in the respect that the relation between philosophy and theism in their thought is complex, controversial, and continues to motivate vigorous debate. In the context of the recently growing interest in more and more figures and periods of the history of philosophy, the medievals are certainly benefiting, being read and studied much more widely than, say, twenty-five or thirty years ago, no less fifty or a hundred years ago. A good deal of fine scholarship on Maimonides, and Spinoza too, has been published in the late twentieth and early twenty-first centuries, and much of it concerns the relations between philosophy and religion. Scholarly debates abound, and in the present discussion I have only hinted at some of the most important of them. One of the benefits of the increased attention to the history of philosophy is that increasing numbers of scholars and students of philosophy are recognizing the profound and ambitious originality of Maimonides’ thought. It is certainly not ‘Aristotle plus Judaism,’ a formulation that barely makes sense.

Maimonides developed an original, important conception of how a tradition anchored in revelation can be understood in philosophically rationalistic terms. As long as we are careful with jargon, we can say that he elaborated a broadly rationalistic conception of revealed religion, wringing out of it mystery, superstition, and any elements inconsistent with truths of reason. It is not difficult to see how his thought could have influenced seventeenth century rationalists.

Among them, Spinoza was a vehement critic of traditional Judaism, and yet there are respects in which his project and Maimonides’ share important features. Spinoza wanted to isolate and separate out from religion whatever rational truths may be embedded in it. In a sense, that is what Maimonides was doing though he argued that a great deal more of the concrete, practical content of the faith-tradition could be shown to be rationally justifiable. His anthropology was, perhaps, less optimistic than Spinoza’s. Maimonides and Spinoza were both centrally concerned with how we are to understand God and God’s relation to everything else. Their views of this matter diverge in decisive ways; after all, Spinoza held that God and nature are one, and Maimonides held that God transcends everything else so completely that we can only attain any understanding of God by way of a negative theology. But in each philosopher’s thought there is a crucial commitment to the notion that happiness depends upon understanding and that a human being’s deepest and most enduring gratifications are attained through disciplined desires and passions along with understanding. There is a deep-seated Stoic-like dimension to Spinoza’s thought, and though the metaphysics is very different from Spinoza’s, Maimonides’ thought also has some Stoic resonances in the way in which it understands relations between reason, freedom, perfection, and the enjoyment of them.

Maimonides was able to influence non-Jewish philosophers because his thought concerns themes and questions that are not ‘local’ to Judaism, even though the way that he pursues those themes and questions is deeply Jewish and attuned to details of Jewish tradition and Jewish life. Still, he understood Judaism as concerned with human perfection. For Maimonides fulfillment of the commandments and fidelity to tradition enable an individual to be perfected as a human being not merely as an excellent Jew. He insisted that no prophecy could exceed Moses’ and that Torah is a perfect instrument for guiding a person to perfection, but the notion of perfection involved in this view includes no element of mystery or an essentialism of a particular people.

In Maimonides’ view, being a Jew is a matter of a person’s ethical and intellectual convictions and commitments, rather than exclusively a matter of ethnicity or lineage. At the same time, the particular history and traditions of the Jewish people had fundamental significance to Maimonides. His philosophy is a powerful, intriguing, and challenging example of the project of finding and articulating universally significant principles, commitments, and ideals in the life and history of a particular people.

12. References and Further Reading

This is a selective bibliography. Maimonides himself wrote a great deal, and the number of works on Maimonides is extensive. This list includes Maimonides’ most important works relevant to philosophy and some of the most important scholarly and interpretive literature on Maimonides.

  • Berman, Lawrence V., “Maimonides, the Disciple of Alfarabi,” in J.A. Buijs (ed.), Maimonides: A Collection of Critical Essays, Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press, 1988.
  • Berman, Lawrence V., “Maimonides on the Fall of Man,” AJS Review, 5, 1980, pp. 1–16.
  • J. David Bleich, “Judaism and Natural Law,” The Jewish Law Annual, Vol. VII, 1988, pp. 5-42.
    • Bleich presents a helpful analysis of whether Maimonides’ ethical thought should be interpreted as a version of natural law theorizing.
  • David Burrell, Freedom and Creation in Three Traditions, Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press, 1993.
    • The essays in this book supply illuminating comparisons of how some of the fundamental elements of Abrahamic monotheism are to be understood in Christian, Jewish, and Islamic thought. The author’s endorsement of Thomistic views on many of the issues comes across clearly.
  • Herbert Davidson, Moses Maimonides. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2005.
  • Marvin Fox, Interpreting Maimonides, Chicago: The University of Chicago Press, 1990.
    • Fox’s interpretation of Maimonides is an attempt to explicate how his views are closer to a certain understanding of Orthodox Judaism than to philosophical views. While Fox’s analysis has been heavily criticized, it is valuable for how it explains Maimonides’ fidelity to religious orthodoxy.
  • Daniel Frank, ‘Reason in Action: The ‘Practicality of Maimonides’ Guide’ in Daniel H. Frank (ed.), Commandment and Community: New Essays in Jewish Legal and Political Philosophy, Albany: SUNY Press, 2002, pp. 69–84.
  • Daniel Frank, “Maimonides and Medieval Jewish Aristotelianism,” in The Cambridge Companion to Medieval Jewish Philosophy, eds., Daniel H. Frank, Oliver Leaman, New York: Cambridge University Press, 2003.
  • Daniel Frank, Oliver Leaman, eds., The Cambridge Companion to Medieval Jewish Philosophy, New York: Cambridge University Press, 2003.
  • Saadia Gaon: The Book of Beliefs & Opinions, trans. by Samuel Rosenblatt, New Haven: Yale University Press, 1976.
    • Saadia set much of the agenda of medieval Jewish philosophy. While Maimonides criticizes him on various matters and objected to Saadia’s philosophical method, study of Saadia is very valuable for understanding the main concerns of medieval Jewish philosophy, especially the current of thought defending Judaism as a religion of reason.
  • Lenn E. Goodman, God of Abraham, New York: Oxford University Press, 1996.
    • This book is a helpful study of many of the main themes of Judaism as a monotheistic religion and Maimonides’ place in the elaboration of those themes.
  • Abraham Halkin and David Hartman, eds., Crisis and Leadership: Epistles of Maimonides, Philadelphia: Jewish Publication Society, 1985.
    • This work contains important shorter works of Maimonides and The Epistle to Yemen mentioned in Section 1 of this article.
  • David Hartman, Torah and Philosophic Quest, Philadelphia: The Jewish Publication Society, 1976.
  • Warren Zev Harvey, “A Portrait of Spinoza as a Maimonidean,” Journal of the History of Philosophy, 19, 1981.
  • Barry Holtz, ed., Back to The Sources: Reading the Classic Jewish Texts, New York: Simon & Schuster, 1986.
    • An excellent collection of essays on the various texts central to Judaism that explains the places of Scripture, Talmud, Midrash, Kabbala, biblical commentary, and philosophical works in the Jewish tradition(s). This is very helpful on account of the large number of references Maimonides makes to several of these texts.
  • Isaac Husik, A History of Mediaeval Jewish Philosophy, New York, Macmillan, 1916.
    • This is a classic study still worth consulting despite being written nearly a century ago.
  • Jonathan Jacobs, Law, Reason, and Morality in Medieval Jewish Philosophy, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2010.
    • This work, focusing on Saadia, Maimonides, and Bahya ibn Pakuda, argues that many elements of their views remain relevant to fundamental questions of metaethics and moral psychology.
  • Jonathan Jacobs, ‘The Epistemology of Moral Tradition: A Defense of aMaimonidean Thesis,” Review of Metaphysics, 64, 1, September 2010, pp. 55-74.
    • Jacobs argues for the claim that Maimonides developed a view of the ‘non-evident rationality’ of tradition and that tradition can be a mode of access to objective ethical understanding.
  • Jonathan Jacobs, “The Reasons of the Commandments: Rational Tradition without Natural Law,” in Reason, Religion and Natural Law: Plato to Spinoza, ed. Jonathan Jacobs, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2012.
    • The author argues that while there are significant points of overlap between Maimonides’ ethical thought and natural law, there are important reasons not to interpret the former as a version of the latter. This has especially to do with the epistemic role of tradition in Maimonides’ thought.
  • Menachem Kellner, Maimonides on Human Perfection, Providence: Brown Judaic Studies, 1990.
    • This is a brief but valuable study of Maimonides’ intellectualist conception of human perfection.
  • Menachem Kellner, Maimonides on Judaism and the Jewish People, Albany: State University of New York Press, 1991.
    • This work explicates how Maimonides’ conception of Judaism differed from other, important conceptions by focusing on the role of intellectual commitments rather than a distinct nature or essence of the Jewish people.
  • Joel Kraemer, ed., Perspectives on Maimonides, Portland: Littman Library of Jewish Civilization, 1996.
  • Joel Kraemer, Maimonides: The Life and World of One of Civilization’s Greatest Minds, New York: Doubleday, 2008.
    • This is an important, recent biography exploring Maimonides’ life and thought in considerable detail.
  • Howard Kreisel, “Imitatio Dei in Maimonides’ Guide of the Perplexed,” AJS Review, 19/2, 1994, pp. 169-211.
  • Kreisel, Howard T., Maimonides’ Political Thought: Studies in Ethics, Lawand the Human Ideal, Albany: SUNY Press, 1999.
  • Kreisel, Howard T., Prophecy: The History of an Idea in Medieval Jewish Philosophy, Dordrecht: Kluwer, 2001.
  • Manekin, Charles, On Maimonides. Belmont, CA.: Wadsworth, 2005.
  • Moses Maimonides: “Eight Chapters,” in Ethical Writings of Maimonides, ed. by Raymond L. Weiss, Charles Butterworth, New York: Dover Publications, Inc., 1975.
    • In this work Maimonides presents many of the main elements of his account of moral psychology, virtue, and freedom of the will. The Aristotelian resonances are pronounced, but there are also important departures from Aristotle.
  • Moses Maimonides, “Laws Concerning Character Traits,” in Ethical Writings of Maimonides, ed. by Raymond L. Weiss, Charles Butterworth, New York: Dover Publications, Inc., 1975.
    • In this work the differences between Maimonides and Aristotle in regard to ethics are evident, especially regarding the role of the mean.
  • Moses Maimonides, “Laws of Repentance,” in Mishneh Torah Book of Knowledge, trans. by Moses Hyamson, Jerusalem: Feldheim Publishers, 1981.
    • In the course of presenting his account of repentance and what is required for it to be genuine, Maimonides also presents important claims and arguments regarding freedom of the will.
  • Moses Maimonides, Guide of the Perplexed trans. by Shlomo Pines, Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1963.
  • Moses Maimonides, Mishneh Torah, “Hilkhot Avel,” 14:1, from A Maimonides Reader, ed. Isadore Twersky, Springfield: Behrman House, 1972.
  • Maimonides, “Basic Principles of the Torah,” Ch. 1, reprinted in A Maimonides Reader, ed. Isadore Twersky, Springfield, NJ: Behrman House, Inc., 1972.
  • Moses Maimonides, A Maimonides Reader, ed. Isadore Twersky, Springfield, NJ: Behrman House, Inc., 1972.
  • Moses Maimonides, Mishneh Torah, trans. Moses Hyamson, Jerusalem: Feldheim Publishers, 1981.
  • Moses Maimonides, Maimonides’ Introduction to His Commentary on the Mishnah, trans. Fred Rosner, Lanham, MD: Jason Aronson, 1994.
  • Louis Newman, “Ethics as Law, Law as Religion: Reflections on the Problem of Law and Ethics in Judaism,” in Contemporary Jewish Ethics and Morality, eds., Elliot N. Dorff, Louis E. Newman, New York: Oxford University Press, 1995.
    • This and the following two works take up the issue of the relation between Jewish law and ethics, explicating key points of similarity and difference.
  • Louis Newman, “Law, Virtue, and Supererogation in the Halakha,” in Past Imperatives: Studies in the History and Theory of Jewish Ethics, Albany: SUNY Press, 1998.
  • David Novak, “Natural Law, Halakha, and the Covenant, in Contemporary Jewish Ethics and Morality, eds. Elliot N. Dorff, Louis E. Newman, New York: Oxford University Press, 1995.
  • David Novak, Natural Law in Judaism, New York: Cambridge University Press, 1998.
    • Novak defends the view that Maimonides should be interpreted as holding a natural law approach to ethics, despite the fact that ‘natural law’ was not part of the idiom he used.
  • Tamar Rudavsky, “Natural Law in Judaism: A Reconsideration,” in Reason, Religion, and Natural Law: From Plato to Spinoza, ed. Jonathan Jacobs, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2012.
    • This essay defends the view that Maimonides’ ethical thought involved natural law elements. Rudavsky’s argument differs from Novak’s and does not include the Kantian elements found in Novak’s analysis.
  • Daniel Rynhold, An Introduction to Medieval Jewish Philosophy, London: I. B. Taurus & Co., Ltd., 2009.
  • Saadia Gaon, The Book of Beliefs & Opinions, trans., Samuel Rosenblatt, New Haven: Yale University Press, 1976.
  • Kenneth Seeskin, Searching For a Distant God: The Legacy of Maimonides, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2000.
  • Kenneth Seeskin, “Metaphysics and Its Transcendence,” in The Cambridge Companion to Maimonides, New York: Cambridge University Press, 2005, p. 89.
  • Kenneth Seeskin, ed. The Cambridge Companion to Maimonides, New York: Cambridge University Press, 2005.
    • This work contains chapters on all of the main topical areas of Maimonides’ philosophical thought.
  • David Shatz,  “Maimonides’ Moral Theory,” The Cambridge Companion to Maimonides, ed. Kenneth Sesskin, New York: Cambridge University Press, 2005, pp. 167-192.
  • M. S. Stern, “Al-Ghazali, Maimonides, and Ibn Paquda on Repentance: A Comparative Model,” Journal of the American Academy of Religion, XLVII/4, pp. 589-607.
    • Repentance is an important issue in all three of the Abrahamic monotheistic traditions, and this article examines some of the chief points of similarity between important Islamic and Jewish thinkers.
  • Shubert Spero, Morality, Halakha and the Jewish Tradition, New York: KTAV Publishing House, Inc., 1983.
  • Baruch Spinoza, Theological-Political Treatise, 2nd ed., trans., Samuel Shirley, Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Company, Inc., 2007.
    • Spinoza was a harsh critic of traditional Judaism and this work contains important elements of his critique while also exhibiting aspects of Maimonides’ influence on Spinoza.
  • Leo Strauss,  “The Literary Character of the Guide for the Perplexed,” in Persecution and the Art of Writing. Glencoe, IL, The Free Press, 1952.
    • Leo Strauss has been a key voice in making the argument for the esotericism of Maimonides’ writings. Readers interested in the debate concerning esotericism may wish to consult Strauss’s works.
  • Leo Strauss, Philosophy and Law: Contributions to the Understanding of Maimonides and His Predecessors, Albany: State University of New York Press, 1995.
  • Sarah Stroumsa, Maimonides in His World, Princeton: Princeton University Press, 2009.
  • Isadore Twersky, Introduction to the Code of Maimonides, New Haven: Yale University Press, 1980.
    • This is an in-depth study of Maimonides’ conception of the relation between law (the commandments) and philosophy. Twersky explains Maimonides’ view that Torah contains philosophical wisdom and how that philosophical wisdom can be found and elaborated.
  • Isadore Twersky, ed., Studies in Maimonides, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Center for Jewish Studies, 1990.


Author Information

Jonathan Jacobs
City University of New York
U. S. A.

Roger Bacon (1214–1292)

Roger Bacon's most noteworthy philosophical accomplishments were in the fields of mathematics, natural sciences, and language studies. A conspicuous feature of his philosophical outlook was his emphasis on the utility and practicality of all scientific efforts. Bacon was convinced that mathematics and astronomy are not morally neutral activities, pursued for their own sake, but have a deep connection to the practical business of everyday life. Bacon was committed to the view that wisdom should contribute to the improvement of life. For example, his extensive works on the reform and reorganization of the university curriculum were, on the surface, aimed at reforming the study of theology; yet, ultimately, they contained a political program whose goal was to civilize humankind as well as to secure peace and prosperity for the whole of the Christian world, both in the hereafter and in this world.

During his long and productive life, he was a Master of Arts and Franciscan friar who was committed to a philosophical outlook that was deeply imbued with Christian principles as well as scientific curiosity and ambition. In many cases, his ideas betray him as a child of his time, and yet his thinking was well in advance of his contemporaries.

Bacon is noteworthy for being one of the West's first commentators and lecturers on Aristotle's philosophy and science. He has been called Doctor Mirabilis (wonderful teacher) and described variously as a rebel, traditionalist, reactionary, martyr to scientific progress, and the first modern scientist. Unfortunately, these romantic epithets tend to blur the actual nature of his philosophical achievements.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Works
    1. Life
    2. Works
      1. Early Works: 1240s–1250s
      2. Works for Pope Clement IV: 1266–1268
      3. Later Works: Late 1260s–1292
  2. The General Trajectory of Roger Bacon’s Philosophy
    1. Utility and Wisdom
    2. The Critique of University Learning
    3. Reform of Education
    4. Human Happiness and the Sciences
  3. Bacon on Language
  4. Mathematics and Natural Sciences
    1. General Remarks
      1. Bacon’s Modification of the Quadrivium
      2. Bacon’s Scientific Views and the Condemnation of 1277
    2. The Nature and Value of Mathematics
      1. The Object and Division of Mathematics
      2. The Methodological Relevance of Mathematics
      3. The Physical Relevance of Mathematics
    3. Bacon’s Theory of Physical Causation and Perspective
    4. Experimental Science
      1. Experience and Experiment
      2. The Three Prerogatives of Experimental Science
      3. Bacon as Experimenter
    5. Alchemy and Medicine
  5. Moral Philosophy
    1. General Scope and Nature of Bacon’s Moral Philosophy
      1. Morality and Happiness
      2. The Place of Moral Philosophy within the Hierarchy of Sciences
      3. Practical Sciences and Human Practice
      4. The Functional Division of Moral Philosophy
    2. Moral Philosophy in the Service of Human Moral Agency
      1. The Conversion of Non-Christians
      2. Moral Works and Eloquence
      3. Rhetoric and Poetics as Branches of Moral Philosophy
  6. Conclusion
  7. References and Further Reading
    1. Bibliographies
    2. Primary Sources
      1. 1240s–1250s
      2. 1250s–1268
      3. 1268–1292
    3. Secondary Sources

1. Life and Works

a. Life

Any attempt to reconstruct Bacon’s life must rely on very few sources, among which the most important is one of Bacon’s own works, Opus Tertium (c. 1267). Since Bacon’s personal report is ambiguous, his biographical data as well as the chronology of his education and career are still a matter of dispute among scholars. Scholars argue as to whether he was born in 1210, 1214, 1215, or even as late as 1220. Despite these disagreements, it is at least agreed that, in view of the funds available to him to pursue his private research, he was likely born into a well-to-do family.

Bacon described his intellectual biography as being divided into two distinct periods: a first “secular” period lasting until around 1257, during which he worked as an academic, and a second period, which he spent as a Franciscan friar “in the pursuit of wisdom.” As a secular scholar, Bacon pursued his academic career at two of the earliest European universities. First he attended the University of Oxford and then the University of Paris. He probably earned his Master of Arts around 1240 and continued his career as a lecturer in the Faculty of Arts at the University of Paris throughout the 1240s. He probably resigned from his post as Regent Master of Arts in Paris in 1247 and returned to Oxford. After this time, Bacon does not seem to have ever held academic office again. The next ten years of Bacon’s life have proven difficult for scholars to reconstruct. It is known that during this time Bacon continued to pursue his scientific and linguistic studies. During this time he probably also received some training in theology by Adam Marsh (d. 1258), the first Regent Master of the Franciscans in Oxford. This training, however, never culminated in a degree in theology. In or around 1257, he joined the Franciscan Order, probably in Oxford. The exact reasons for why he chose this order are unknown, but there are reasons to think that he hoped the Franciscans would support his scholarly interests. After all, the Oxford Franciscans had attracted prominent scholars such as Robert Grosseteste (d. 1253) and Adam Marsh.

The beginning of the 1260s found Bacon again in Paris. It has been speculated that he was transferred there by the superiors of his order because of growing suspicion about his scientific studies. While in Paris, he finished several of his major works, including Opus Maius (OM), Opus Minus (OMi), and Opus Tertium (OT). The exact details of Bacon’s whereabouts and doings in the decades before his death remain uncertain. It seems clear, however, that he returned to Oxford sometime after 1278. Between 1277 and 1279, he was supposedly condemned to house arrest by the Franciscans’ Master General Jerome of Ascoli. The charge against him was that some of his doctrines contained “certain suspected novelties.” What these novelties were—whether relating to his teachings on alchemy, astronomy, experimental science, or his radical spiritual leanings—cannot be determined with precision (Easton, 1952, 192-202). Bacon’s punishment  can likely be explained in the context of the Parisian Condemnations of 1270 and 1277. In the last years of his life, Bacon continued to work on what was, in all likelihood, his last treatise, Compendium Studii Theologie. He died in 1292, or soon thereafter, in Oxford.

b. Works

i. Early Works: 1240s–1250s

During his time at the Faculty of Arts at the University of Paris, Bacon lectured on many Aristotelian texts, the so-called libri naturales, including On the Soul, On Sense and the Sensible, Physics, Metaphysics, and probably On Generation and Corruption. Not all of these lectures have survived. We possess copies of two lectures on Physics, three lectures on different books of Metaphysics as well as lectures on the pseudo-Aristotelian works, Book of Causes and On Plants. The form of these lectures is that of quaestiones, or ‘questions’, which involve the presentation of expository and critical questions combined with explanatory comments. These lectures represent Bacon’s earliest teachings on topics such as causality, motion, being, soul, substance, and truth. Bacon’s quaestiones were not written by Bacon himself, but consist in notes that his students took during his lectures. These notes might have been checked later by Bacon for accuracy. With the exception of a set of quaestiones on Physics II–IV, these writings survive in one single manuscript. These lectures—together with the lectures of Richard Rufus of Cornwall (d. 1260) —mark some of the earliest known examinations of Aristotle’s Metaphysics and the libri naturales from the Faculty of Arts at Paris.

During the 1240s and 1250s, Bacon composed a series of works on logical and grammatical matters dealing with syntactic as well as semantic issues. These include the Summa Grammatica (‘Summary of Grammar’; c. 1245), Summa de Sophismatibus et Distinctionibus (‘Summary of Sophisms and Distinctions’; c. 1240–1245) and Summulae Dialectices (‘Summary of Dialectics’; probably completed after Bacon’s return to Oxford in the 1250s). These works show that Bacon was one of the earliest proponents of the so-called terminist logic. Terminist logic was referred to by medieval scholars as Logica Modernorum or Moderna (‘contemporary logic’), and was originated by scholars such as William of Sherwood (d. 1266/72) and Petrus Hispanus (d. 1277). Contemporary logic was so-called by the medieval masters themselves in order to describe and distinguish their new, contextual approach toward logic, which consisted in an emphasis on the analysis of the signifying properties of terms in a propositional as well as a pragmatic context.

Sometime in the late 1250s or early 1260s Bacon composed another treatise entitled De Multiplicatione Specierum (‘On the Multiplication of Species’). In this work Bacon developed a doctrine that he considered to be central to his natural philosophy. Specifically, he aimed in this work to explain natural causation through the concept of species; more will be said about this matter this below.

ii. Works for Pope Clement IV: 1266–1268

The works for which Bacon is most widely known are a group of writings commissioned by Pope Clement IV, comprising the Opus Maius, Opus Minus, and Opus Tertium. All of these works are rhetorical in the sense that Bacon attempted to persuade the Pope to support his research and to help him to implement his projected reform of studies. The reform program suggested by Bacon was very extensive and encompassed the study of languages, mathematics, the natural sciences, moral philosophy, and theology.

The circumstances under which Bacon composed these works are well documented in his own statements. Sometime in the early 1260s, Bacon sought the patronage of Cardinal Guy de Foulques, papal legate to England during the Civil War. From the ensuing correspondence it became clear that the cardinal would not provide the funds Bacon needed to complete his writings but that he was nevertheless interested in Bacon’s reform ideas. He asked Bacon to send him his writings. Bacon had nothing to send to the cardinal, however, because completing his works required money for books, scientific equipment, and copyists—money Bacon did not have. In 1265, however, the situation changed dramatically when Cardinal Guy de Foulques was elected Pope Clement IV. Bacon soon sent the new Pope a letter asking for aid, to which the Pope replied in June 1266, asking Bacon to send the writings containing “the remedies for the critical problems” Bacon had mentioned to him a few years before and to do so “as quickly and secretly as possible.” Yet, in 1266 Bacon’s financial needs were no different from a few years before. In addition to Bacon’s financial predicament, there was another complicating factor at work: the Franciscan Order was in a time of crisis over dogmatic issues, and in response to these issues, the General chapter at Narbonne (1260) imposed strict censorship on the Order and forbade direct communication with the papal curia. Under these conditions—insufficient funds, time pressure, forbidden communication with the Pope, and growing suspicion within the order against Bacon’s own scientific and spiritual leanings—Bacon was forced to compose a much shorter, more rhetorical work (or persuasio), rather than the longer work (scriptum principale) he originally envisioned. In a short period of time, Bacon completed several writings, rhetorically structured in a way so as to best persuade the Pope of his ideas. Late in 1267 or early in 1268 he sent out the Opus Maius, partly patched together from previous writings, and the Opus Minus. It was common practice for Bacon to borrow from his other works; the fourth part of the Opus Maius contained an abbreviation of the earlier De Multiplicatione Specierum. The Opus Tertium was probably never sent. The works arrived safely. However, since the Pope died in 1268, it remains unknown whether he had a chance to study Bacon’s works, and, if he did, how he received them.

iii. Later Works: Late 1260s–1292

Although historical evidence for Bacon’s whereabouts during the final stage of his career is scarce, it is certain that he remained active. In the late 1260s and early 1270s, while still in Paris, he may have worked on the Communia Mathematica and Communia Naturalium; the polemic Compendium Studii Philosophiae (CSP) was probably written around 1272. He put together basic grammars for both Greek and Hebrew, and he also wrote two medical treatises, De Erroribus Medicorum and Antidotarius. Sometime in the two decades before his death, he completed his elaborate edition of the pseudo-Aristotelian Secretum Secretorum for which he prepared a redaction of the text, annotated it, and wrote an accompanying introductory treatise (Williams, 1994). His last work, written when he was around seventy years old, was a treatise on semiotics, the Compendium Studii Theologie, which is incomplete.

2. The General Trajectory of Roger Bacon’s Philosophy

a. Utility and Wisdom

The length of Bacon’s career and the diversity of his philosophical interests and accomplishments make it impossible to capture his philosophy in a simple summary. In regard to Bacon’s work on Aristotle and the Arab commentators during his first stay in Paris, one could speak of Bacon as a pioneer in Aristotelian studies.  Yet these early works give little hint of his later and much more specialized interests in science, semantics, moral philosophy, and Christian theology. Bacon’s later work as a Franciscan scholar differed significantly from his earlier work in both content and purpose.

A possible reason for the change in Bacon’s scholarly interests may have been his encounter with the pseudo-Aristotelian work Secretum Secretorum while at Paris during the 1240s. The Secretum Secretorum was composed in the form of a pseudo-epigraphical letter from Aristotle to Alexander the Great, belonging to the literary genre mirrors for princes. With the purpose of providing insight into the art of government, the anonymous author treats of secret doctrines useful to a political ruler, among which are ethics, alchemy, and medicine. It might be the case that Bacon, after reading the Secretum, was inspired to develop the vision that henceforth guided his philosophical efforts and consisted of a conception of Christian learning applicable to the needs of humankind, both worldly and otherworldly. For a critical evaluation of the supposed influence of the Secretum Secretorum on Bacon’s views see Williams, 1997, 368-372. The principles around which his thoughts subsequently developed had a strong connection to concrete socio-political affairs, and his outlook on the sciences became focused on applicability, practicality, and usefulness. This practical outlook on the sciences, as being in the service of humankind, manifested itself in positive and negative remarks made in writings like the Opus Maius or Compendium Studii Philosophiae. His negative remarks consisted of incessant critiques of what he perceived to be the desolate, that is, practically useless, state of learning during his time. His positive remarks focused on proposals about the benefits and possibilities of the practical application of the different branches of knowledge.

The medieval use of the term science should not be confused with the modern use, which is distinct from philosophical and  theological inquiry. Rather, 13th century thinkers understood the term science in accordance with the Aristotelian framework of epistemic or apodeictic knowledge. According to Aristotle in Posterior Analytics, science denotes intellectual comprehension of a true, necessary, and universal proposition, known or presented in the form of a demonstrative proof and providing an understanding of why the proposition is true. In other words, Aristotelian science involves knowledge of a reasoned fact—an understanding of science that is far broader than the modern understanding of empirical science. Despite the fact that almost all scholastics endorsed the Aristotelian paradigm of science, there was wide variation in the medieval scholars’ accounts of the foundation and scope of Aristotelian science, depending on their ontological, epistemological, and logical commitments.  Bacon, like other thinkers, oftentimes used the terms science and philosophy interchangeably, thereby referring to a group of disciplines that conform to the aforementioned Aristotelian paradigm. According to Bacon, the sciences or philosophy comprise disparate disciplines such as moral philosophy and metaphysics.

The pivotal concepts around which all of Bacon’s philosophical efforts revolved were utilitas (‘utility’) and sapientia (‘wisdom’). Bacon used the concept of utility in the context of his reflections on the relation, scope, and goal of the sciences. More specifically, he used the term in two senses: (1) to describe the hierarchy between the sciences and (2) to refer to the function of the sciences, namely, the improvement of the physical and spiritual well-being of humankind in this world and the next. With respect to the hierarchy of the sciences, he regarded the theoretical sciences to be subordinate to the practical sciences. For him, the former is instrumental in achieving the goals of the latter. Here it is important to keep in mind that Bacon’s conception of philosophy did not entail the patristic idea that philosophy is merely a handmaiden of theology (philosophia ancilla theologiae). Philosophy, although useful for theology, is not reduced to theology. On the contrary, Bacon believed that theology, in order to fulfill its purpose, was heavily reliant on philosophy (OM II, vol. 3, 36). And yet, the utility of both philosophy and theology ultimately refer to the God-ordained purpose of the created world, which Bacon recognized in the return of all creatures to their divine origin.

Concerning wisdom, Bacon uses the term to refer to the complete body of knowledge given by God to humankind for the purpose of humankind’s happiness and salvation. In a sense, all knowledge for Bacon was contained in the Scriptures and should be unfolded by philosophy and canon law.  The manner, however, in which philosophy unfolds the basic truths in the Scriptures is different from the manner of theology. According to Bacon, these “exegetic” disciplines, philosophy and canon law, were first revealed to the early prophets and patriarchs and then handed down through generations of true “lovers of wisdom, ” like prophets, patriarchs, and pagan philosophers, in the form of divine and secular texts. Bacon presented the process of the transmission of knowledge by way of an elaborate genealogy (OM I, vol. 3, 53f). He deemed it necessary to provide a comprehensive defense of wisdom together with the means by which it could be restored because he perceived his contemporaries to be limiting wisdom in scope and content, in fact to be corrupting it.  The transmission of knowledge  was unfolded imperfectly due to the sins of some philosophers.. The targets of Bacon’s critique very well may have been the Parisian “Artists,” some of whom understood the search for wisdom to be a purely theoretical and specialized endeavor, or Bacon’s own Minister General Bonaventure who condemned suspicious disciplines like experimental science and alchemy. Thus the scientific vision Bacon began to promote in the 1260s consisted of very detailed and specific normative reflections on the status of learning, for which he sought the support of Pope Clement IV.

b. The Critique of University Learning

The critique of university learning that Bacon developed in several of his writings encompassed philosophy as well as theology. According to Bacon, neither the philosophy nor theology of his time adequately embody the wisdom God revealed to humankind. On the contrary, in both philosophy and theology Bacon perceived numerous errors, lacunae, and forms of corruption.  Thus he neither held back from denouncing them nor balked at accusing individual scholars of contributing to the demise of learning. In regard to the content of the curricula, for example, Bacon criticized the erroneous emphasis on logic and a particular kind of grammar and instead called for emphasis on rhetoric and the study of foreign languages. In several of his writings, most prominently in Opus Maius, Compendium Studii Philosophiae, and Compendium Studii Theologiae, he presented examples of ignorance, corruption, and error.

The scope of his critique of learning extended beyond the academy as well. Bacon drew connections between the state of affairs in the academy and the state of affairs in society because he did not regard these two spheres as separate but rather intimately connected. Bacon often stated that “by the light of wisdom the Church of God is governed, the republic of the faithful regulated, the conversion of infidels accomplished, and those who are obstinate in their malice, are more efficiently swayed toward the goals of the Church by the power of wisdom than by the shedding of Christian blood” (OM I, vol. 3, 1). Following from this, Bacon believed that the ultimate purpose of eradicating academic errors extended to the improvement of society. Bacon held that vain and useless academic practice was the cause of the ecclesiastic corruptions of pride, greed, and lust. In addition, Bacon did not spare worldly rulers from criticism (CSP, ch. 1, 398-400).

In his Opus Maius, Bacon pointed out four causes of error: (1) the example of unreliable and unsuited authorities, (2) the long duration of habit, (3) the opinion of the ignorant masses, and (4) the propensity of humans for disguising ignorance by the display of pseudo-wisdom. Bacon judged that all human evil is a result of these errors, and thus the reform that Bacon intended had to begin with reform in the educational institutions and the sciences. For example, Bacon identified one group of obstacles to wisdom in the practices of university teachers.  The teachers wasted time and money on useless things and subjects because, instead of intellectual humility, they indulged in conformity and vanity (OM I, vol. 3, 2f). Thus scientific errors cast a long shadow, and the reform of learning was the only way  by which to remedy society’s academic, social, and political troubles as they existed within the Christian community or even beyond it, in regard to the interactions with non-Christians such as Saracens or Jews.

c. Reform of Education

The reform program that Bacon proposed to Pope Clement IV was comprehensive in that it involved theology as well as most philosophical disciplines. Bacon revealed his depreciatory judgment of certain theological practices when in his Opus Minus he listed “the seven sins of the principal study which is theology”  (OMi, 322). He included the “modern” practice of theologians introducing questions into theology that properly belong to the province of philosophy, such as questions about celestial bodies, matter and being, how the soul perceived through images or similitudes, and how souls and angels moved locally. In addition to questions of content, Bacon also found fault with the methods employed by modern theologians. For example, Bacon complained that questions about the sacraments or the Trinity were addressed using philosophical methods involving philosophical terminology, arguments and conceptual distinctions rather than using proper traditional Scriptural exegesis. Exegesis, on the other hand, suffered because of (1) the overemphasis placed on Peter Lombard’s (d. c.1160) Four Books of Sentences, (2) the deficient state of the Paris Vulgate, and (3) the neglect and ignorance of those sciences most useful for an accurate literal understanding of the text, which would advance exegesis according to the spiritual senses (OMi, 322-359).

Bacon proposed extensive reform measures to remedy these problems. He advised providing new translations of philosophical works and the Scriptures prepared by translators who were experts not only with regard to mastery of the respective languages but also the philosophical and theological material. Bacon called for an extensive modification of the curricula. He wanted to  implement disciplines that were of real value to the progress of learning and that were not being studied properly at the time, like perspective (optics), experimental science, and alchemy. He also wanted to reform disciplines that, although being taught and studied, were studied with a wrong focus; here Bacon pointed to logic. For the use of the term progress in relation to Bacon see Molland, 1978, 567-571. For Bacon, studying logic was neither an end in itself nor the basis for the other sciences. On the contrary, Bacon held that logic is instrumentally valuable to theology and philosophy only insofar as it promotes understanding through semiotic and semantic analyses. It becomes superfluous when practiced as an inquiry into rules of argumentation. This was judged to be so because, according to Bacon, the knowledge of such rules is innate, which explains why logic does not provide scientists with special methodological principles or rules (OT, ch. xxviii, 102f). To counteract his contemporaries’ emphasis on logic, Bacon proposed to focus instead on mathematics.  He believed neither philosophical nor theological matters could be properly understood without employing mathematics (OM IV, vol. 3, 175). Bacon’s reform program included the introduction of five main sciences that he thought were neglected or misunderstood by his contemporaries. Apart from mathematics, these were the science of languages, perspective, moral philosophy, experimental science, and alchemy. According to Bacon, these sciences were more conducive to the advancement of the mind, the body, and society than some of the sciences preferred by his contemporaries, such as logic, the less significant parts of natural philosophy, and a part of metaphysics. (OMi, 323f).

d. Human Happiness and the Sciences

Bacon’s later research in logic and languages, moral philosophy, and the natural sciences were fueled by his conviction that the spheres of scientific work and of everyday life were intimately connected. Bacon believed that the status of learning affects the quality of individuals’ lives in a variety of ways. After all, erroneous ideas or theories can yield harmful social consequences.  Knowledge and learning are not private affairs but have a socio-political dimension. Thus he was persuaded that the sciences, both secular and divine, should serve human society as a whole in reaching happiness and salvation. He subsequently determined the respective rank of each science by the degree of its usefulness, that is, how much each of them contributed to human happiness. The theoretical sciences were thus subordinated to the practical goal of human happiness, as mentioned above. Since, according to Bacon, human happiness consists in salvation as understood by Christians, the highest science is Sacred doctrine or theology. Yet despite its formal supremacy, theology is still dependent on philosophy in that theology is incapable of accomplishing its goal without philosophy, that is, grammar, mathematics, experimental science, and moral philosophy (OM II, vol. 3, 36). In relation to theology, Bacon held moral philosophy to be the second highest discipline because it aims at salvation within the secular context of natural reason rather than revelation (MP I, §4, 4). In turn, Bacon held that the theoretical sciences, such as mathematics, are subordinate to moral philosophy. The goal of mathematics consists of explaining and describing the structure of the natural world, providing a kind of knowledge that contributes to practical ends only indirectly. Whereas, by contrast, the knowledge provided by moral philosophy is of immediate practical value.

According to Bacon, then, scientific research has an overall moral orientation, with both an emphasis on the afterlife and also an eye on practical worldly affairs. (CSP, ch. i, 395). The unifying purpose of all scientific study for Bacon is practical, which is why the practical sciences have priority over the theoretical. The practical value of a science is determined by the degree to which each science contributes to the improvement of human life. Improvements can be secondary, by technical innovation, or primary, by guiding the moral and spiritual life of humans, exhorting people to a virtuous and law-abiding practice that will ultimately be rewarded with eternal happiness: salvation in union with God.

3. Bacon on Language

Like many of his contemporaries, Roger Bacon attached great value to issues pertaining to the so-called Trivium. The Trivium, or the ‘three ways’ or ‘three roads’ of learning, was comprised of grammar, logic, and rhetoric.  The Trivium constituted the trivial, that is, fundamental, part of the learning system, which consisted of the seven liberal arts, that was in place during late antiquity and much of medieval times. The remaining four arts, called the Quadrivium, were the mathematical disciplines: arithmetic, geometry, astronomy, and music.

Bacon’s study of language was broad, extending from semantics and semiotics to philology as well as to the socio-cultural question of the place of language studies within institutions of higher learning and society as a whole. Bacon's study of speech and languages was not merely theoretical. His interest in understanding language, and his personal study of foreign languages like Hebrew and Greek,was motivated by his belief in the eminent practical importance of the study of speech and language. Bacon considered language mastery necessary for four purposes: (1) ecclesiastical functions, (2) the reform of knowledge, (3) the conversion of infidels, and (4) the battle against the Antichrist. Generally speaking, the goal of Bacon’s concern for languages was, in both his linguistic as well as his philological efforts, situated within the wider context of his intended reform of learning, aimed at the “Church and the Republic of the Faithful.”  In addition, Bacon considered the knowledge of language, including an understanding of how words signify, an important prerequisite for any kind of philosophical or theological pursuit.

In Bacon’s work on linguistic and philological matters one can distinguish between two different stages. In the first stage, represented by the Summa grammatica, Summa de Sophismatibus et Distinctionibus, and Summulae Dialectices, we find Bacon’s contributions to the problem of universal quantification and to semantic problems revolving around the properties of terms. In particular, Bacon worked here on the problem of univocal appellation and predication in regards to what are called empty classes.  Bacon’s solutions, especially to the semantic problems, provide the theoretical background against which he continued to develop his doctrines during the second stage of his work on logic and linguistic matters. In the second stage, represented by the De Signis and Compendium Studii Theologiae, Bacon worked on a theory of analogy, developed a theory of the imposition of signs, and, related to this, developed a view of the definition and classification of signs. The Compendium Studii Theologiae represents a later adjustment of the material brought forth in the De Signis.  His work on philology stems largely from this later phase and is contained mainly in the Opus Tertium and Compendium Studii Philosophiae. He also wrote a Greek grammar, Oxford Greek Grammar, the first of its kind in the west and a work which he considered to be no more than an “introduction to the Greek language.” In these writings Bacon studied grammar insofar as it (1) pertained and contributed to the reading and speaking of languages and (2) contributed to an improvement of the methods and instruments of textual criticism.

Bacon’s views on logic and language included some unique claims and arguments. Bacon’s work on semantic problems—such as connotation and equivocation—was especially noteworthy. In his early work Summa de sophismatibus et distinctionibus, written in Paris, Bacon contributed to the debate on semantic information contained in ambiguous sentences.  The theory of so-called natural sense, popular among some 13th century logicians, proposed that semantic information is grounded in the order in which terms are organized in a sentence. Bacon believed, however, that other aspects of communication must be considered. Sentence structure alone is not sufficient to decode the semantic information contained in a sentence. He challenged the theory of natural sense in his doctrine of the “generation of speech” by emphasizing the relation between the intention of the speaker, linguistic form, and interpretation of the hearer in the context of understanding meaning. In short, understanding semantic information is, for him, a matter of interpretation. Another important claim of Bacon’s, which connects the early Summulae dialectices with the later De signis, relates to the question of whether terms can univocally signify existent and nonexistent, or universal and particular entities. For Bacon, terms like Caesar or Christ signify presently existing entities only and signify equivocally when predicated of a dead person. This semantic position, which would classify Bacon today as a semantic externalist, put Bacon in opposition to a number of his contemporaries, most famously Richard of Cornwall.

In addition to semantics, Bacon also did important work in semiotics and signification and developed views which in some cases were radically different from 13th century mainstream opinion. He challenged a number of common tenets on the nature of signs. Bacon worked within the Augustinian framework, according to which signs are in the category of relation,  and emphasized that signification is a three-term relation. A sign, take a word for example, is a sign of something to some interpreter.  More specifically, Bacon’s theory of signs stressed the “pragmatic” relation of the sign to the interpreter and thus underscored the context in which a sign is situated instead of the sign’s relation to the significate, as was the commonly held opinion. Another important element in his work in semantics is his analysis of imposition, that is, the act of name-giving. He distinguishes between two modes of imposition: (1) the very first imposition by the first name-giver and (2) subsequently applying a name to something different than what the name signifies according to its first imposition. Bacon thought of the very first imposition as an act similar to baptism. He understood it in terms of a situation in which a word is chosen as a label for a present thing. After which, the thing is called by that name.  In other words, the first imposition is the act by which a human name-giver decides to use a sound to refer to a thing and thereby endows that sound with meaning, and a word is created. However, according to Bacon, speakers have the power to change the meaning of words in situations in which they need to express something they currently lack a word for or in which the particular thing which the word originally named ceases to exist. Bacon argued that the use of a word is not restricted to the meaning endowed to it during the first act of imposition. On the contrary, a speaker may apply a word to any other object, thereby imposing a new meaning and making the term equivocal. The term’s interpretation then depends on the speaker’s intention. Bacon believed that these kinds of modifications of meanings of words occur tacitly and constantly and sometimes even without people being conscious of it. Bacon considers metaphors as a prevalent example of second imposition. In addition, Bacon also developed a comprehensive classification of signs or modes of signification, into which he integrated substantial semantic analyses. According to Bacon’s notion of signification, as part of his theory of imposition, signs immediately signify the things themselves rather than mental concepts or representations of things in the mind of the speaker.

4. Mathematics and Natural Sciences

a. General Remarks

Among Roger Bacon’s most widely known contributions to philosophy are his reflections and arguments pertaining to the fields of mathematics and the natural sciences.  Within the latter, Bacon is especially known for his emphasis on experience and on experimental science (scientia experimentalis), including optics, also called perspective (perspectiva or scientia de aspectibus). Many of his reflections on the physical world were presented in the context of his extensive critique of university learning dating from the 1260s, which oftentimes lent a rhetorical and pedagogical tenor. However, Bacon’s contributions to this field were not restricted to polemics. Apart from the papal opera (Opus Maius, Opus Minus, and Opus Tertium), his most important works on mathematical and physical topics were the De Multiplicatione Specierum (‘On the Multiplication of Species’; dated prior to the papal opera), the Communia Naturalium, and the Communia Mathematica, both dated after 1267.

Bacon’s accomplishments in these fields do not consist of reports of concrete scientific practice or specific methodological guidance in experimentation. On the whole, his work in mathematics and the natural sciences was more theoretical. He defended noteworthy pedagogical and methodological insights pertaining to the mathematization of natural philosophy for example. He also made the somewhat successful effort to reconcile the disparate Platonic and Aristotelian scientific approaches and thereby present a practicable and convincing synthesis (Fisher and Unguru, 1971, 375; Lindberg, 1979, 268).

i. Bacon’s Modification of the Quadrivium

In the Latin medieval tradition, arithmetic, geometry, music, and astrology were subsumed into the Quadrivium. Together with the so-called Trivium (grammar, logic, rhetoric), they formed the two parts of the seven liberal arts (septem artes liberales). At the time the seven liberal arts were considered to be branches of philosophy. All of the quadrivial or mathematical arts dealt with quantity, the principle according to which things were said to be equal or unequal. Arithmetic and music dealt with discrete quantities, or numbers, whereas geometry and astronomy dealt with continuous quantities, such as lines. Traditionally, the mathematical or quadrivial disciplines constituted the medieval “scientific syllabus” in that they studied the natural world. Under the metaphysical assumption that every physical entity was formed through the essence of number and that physical phenomena could thus be “broken down” into arithmetical or geometrical terms, the natural world could be described using the quadrivial disciplines. Astronomy, for example, studied the motion of celestial bodies by employing numerical calculation and geometry.

Bacon’s concern for the quadrivial disciplines was ultimately ethical. By procuring the Pope’s support for a reform of liberal arts studies, he hoped to improve student learning and to boost scientific progress, which would ultimately serve the development of moral persons. (For the use of the term progress in regard to Bacon see Molland 1978.) For this purpose, Bacon modified the inherited division by adding new sciences to the traditional four. He identified a list of seven “special sciences,” among which he included perspective (optics), judicial astronomy (astrology), the science of weights, medicine, experimental science, alchemy, and agriculture. Bacon held that three of these sciences are especially important: judicial astronomy, alchemy, and experimental science (CN, I, 5). Yet, beyond just listing sciences worthy of study, Bacon made the case for new ways in which to approach some of the more established sciences, thereby introducing hitherto less known or neglected sources. In the case of perspective, for example, he advocated the use of Alhazen’s (al-Hasan ibn al-Haytham) De Aspectibus, or Perspectiva.

Bacon considered his contemporaries’ neglect of these “special sciences” to have detrimental consequences not only for the progress of learning but for the state of society as a whole. He reproached teachers and scholars of medicine for approaching their field in the wrong way because they neglected mathematics and experimentation. He scolded theologians for ignoring the “greater sciences” in their study of the Scriptures. Bacon thought a reform of liberal arts studies in general, and the Quadrivium in particular, was imperative because of the eminent utility of the mathematical and natural sciences. An improved understanding of the natural world would benefit Scriptural hermeneutics in that an understanding of the Scriptures' literal sense would lead to an improved understanding of their spiritual sense. Bacon believed his reforms would also foster a practical operative knowledge capable of alleviating all sorts of human ailments or of ensuring Christians’ supremacy in warfare. Although dissatisfaction with the status quo of teaching and research constituted much of Bacon's apology of the sciences, he also presented  original material on scientific method, in Scientia Experimentalis for example, as well as original scientific content,  like in his doctrine of physical causation.

ii. Bacon’s Scientific Views and the Condemnation of 1277

In advocating the “special sciences,” Bacon was concerned with the intellectual climate in which he found himself. The climate in Paris prior to Bishop Étienne Tempier’s issuance of a condemnation in 1277 was that of suspicion against Bacon’s most favored sciences: judicial astronomy, alchemy, and experimental science. With regard to the atmosphere in the Franciscan order, it is possible that Bonaventure, Bacon’s superior, partly had Bacon in mind when in his Collationes (1273) he accused “Aristotelian” philosophy of being at odds with Christian dogma. Thus much of Bacon’s presentation of, for example, judicial astrology and celestial influence was informed by wariness. He did not want to be charged with necessitarianism, the view that celestial events determine worldly events;among the doctrines impugned by Bishop Tempier was astrological determinism. In the context of alchemy and experimental science Bacon heeded the danger of being denounced for magic (OM IV, vol. 1, 137-139). However, Bacon was an outspoken supporter of natural magic, and he accused his opponents of “infinite stupidity” and deserving of being ridiculed as asses (asini) for ignoring the utility and benefits of judicial astronomy (OT, ch. lxv, 270). To forestall possible objections and charges, Bacon went to great lengths to distinguish magic proper, doctrines and practices accomplished with the help of demons, from “natural magic,” wondrous and awe-inspiring physical phenomena. He defended the respective sciences by naturalizing them. He provided arguments showing that seemingly magical effects imitate nature in their operations and do not use the aid of demons. One very important element in Bacon’s naturalistic explanation of supposedly magical phenomena, like astrological influence, was his theory of physical causation, best known as the multiplication of species (multiplicatio specierum, discussed further below). For Bacon’s view on magic see Molland 1974.

It is commonly agreed, however, that in certain respects Bacon’s views bordered on magical traditions. This is evident from his text De Secretis Operibus Artis et Naturae (‘On the Secret Works of Art and Nature,’ c. 1267) as well as from the third prerogative of experimental science in which Bacon’s imagination ran wild, projecting marvels like ever-burning lamps. These writings were kindled by the desire to benefit State and Church (OM VI, vol. 2, 217).

b. The Nature and Value of Mathematics

Secondary literature is not entirely favorable towards Bacon’s achievements in mathematics. It is commonly agreed that Bacon was not a creative mathematician. Yet it is also widely recognized that Bacon was well read and had a solid comprehension of the standard sources of 13th century mathematics. Bacon’s originality was more “in his thoughts about mathematics” rather than in his theoretical innovations (Fisher and Unguru, 1971, 355).

i. The Object and Division of Mathematics

Bacon adopted an Aristotelian abstractionist view of the objects of mathematical inquiry. Mathematics is the science dealing with objects whose principle was quantity. The form of quantity, though, had to be abstracted from motion and corporeal matter before it could be investigated by arithmetic or geometry. Although quantity exists in matter, in mathematics quantity is considered as abstracted from matter and motion. Bacon insisted, however, that in this abstracting procedure the imagination does not run the risk of positing quantity to exist by itself, in the manner of a Platonic form. That would defeat the purpose of mathematical inquiry, which is performed for utilitarian reasons, specifically for the sake of “corporeal quantity,” not for the sake of quantity itself (CM, 59).

One element that stands out in Bacon’s reflections about mathematics has to do with the division of the mathematical sciences, mainly presented in the third distinction of his Communia Mathematica. For pedagogical purposes, Bacon thought it important to distinguish between two principal branches of mathematical study. One branch deals with the universal themes of mathematics in terms of its “elements and roots;” this first branch can be termed common mathematics. The second branch deals with the specialized domains of geometry, arithmetic, music, and astronomy.

The second principal branch of mathematics is divided into two main parts: a speculative and a practical part. Following from this, each of the proper mathematical sciences can be seen, according to Bacon, to have a speculative as well as a practical side. For example, while the speculative part of geometry considers contiguous quantity removed from any practical concerns, the practical part of geometry applies geometrical insights to operational, concrete interests (CM, 38f) In either case, speculation must precede practice, which meant that Bacon considered mathematical theory to be subjugated to technological practice.

The postulation of “common mathematics” is considered to be the most original element of Bacon’s division of mathematics. In this context, Bacon leveled a critique of Euclid’s Elements, despite the fact that he believed Euclid was an important authority in the history of mathematics. Again, for Bacon, mathematics is the science dealing with quantity. The different specialized parts of mathematics deal with different kinds of quantity. Arithmetic and music deal with discrete quantities such as numbers. Geometry and astronomy deal with continuous quantities such as lines. The concept of quantity in general, however, could not be fully understood without a comprehension of the meaning of related concepts such as finite, infinite, position, and contiguous. Bacon criticized Euclid for being oblivious to a thorough treatment of these concepts. Such a treatment could be made by separating out a realm of common mathematics, which deals with quantity in general, and could be expressed by basic principles common to all mathematics (Molland, 1997, 165-168).

ii. The Methodological Relevance of Mathematics

Bacon’s favorite maxim in scientific matters consisted in emphasizing the utility of each science. As we have seen, this lead him to subjugate scientific research to the spiritual and concrete practical needs and interests of human beings. Since, for Bacon, the utility of a science is linked to its end, the end informs choices of content and form for each science. In other words, it did not only matter what was studied, but also how the results of those studies were presented to those needing instruction. In this respect, mathematics is no exception. A considerable part of Bacon’s reflections on mathematics were characterized by this “utilitarian” approach. It is not surprising, then, that Bacon considered mathematics to have no intrinsic value. According to Bacon, the mathematical disciplines (arithmetic, geometry, music, and astronomy) are of solely instrumental value. Doing mathematics should by no means be a purely theoretical inquiry. Yet, while emphasizing Bacon’s conviction that mathematics has no intrinsic value, it should not be overlooked that Bacon regarded mathematical study as instrumentally good for all the other sciences, including theology. Indeed, almost the whole of the fourth part of the Opus Maius is devoted to the presentation of the utility of mathematics in matters secular and divine.

According to Bacon, mathematics is “the gate and key” to the other sciences. Bacon regarded the comprehension of mathematical truth as being among the first steps in the order of cognition because “it is, so to speak, innate in us.” Mathematical objects by their very nature “are more knowable by us,” therefore, it is with these objects that our learning should commence (OM IV, vol. 1, 103-105). Indeed, Bacon went on to claim that a scientist who is ignorant of mathematics cannot have certain knowledge of either the other sciences or worldly matters. Mathematics, Bacon stressed, trained the mind for future study and raised the degree of knowledge acquired by the mind to the level of certainty (OM IV, vol. 1, 97). In other words, in order to practice the other sciences with a proper level of sophistication, or at all, mathematics is required. If the scientist’s goal is to truly understand the physical world, then she had to employ mathematics. This means that although mathematics is epistemologically vital to the progress of other sciences, it is not their queen in terms of dictating ends. In the order of learning, mathematics is ranked on the lower end (Molland, 1997, 164).

When Bacon stated that scientific study seeks to attain truths about the world, the term truth connotes a kind of knowledge in virtue. The human mind becomes peaceful in its scientific quest (ut quiescat animus in intuitu veritatis). To reach this state requires sense-based experience that brings the truth of scientific conclusions face-to-face with the scientist. In Bacon’s view, mathematics as well is subject to the general rule that the empirical dimension is essential to proper knowledge. For example, for a student to fully grasp the proof of the Euclidian equilateral triangle, she needs to see it actually being constructed (OM VI, vol. 2, 168). However, it is not simply the case that mathematics requires a verification of its conclusions through the aid of experiencing, as if this kind of experience were external to mathematical procedure. The reason why mathematical procedures are a guarantor for scientific certainty, according to Bacon, lies exactly in the fact that sense experience is an integral part of it. In mathematics there are necessary demonstrations that, because proceeding by way of necessary cause, achieve full and certain truth without error. In addition mathematics contains certifying experience as an intrinsic component of its basic operations, insofar as it has examples and tests that can be perceived by the senses, such as drawing figures or counting (OM IV, vol. 1, 105f). Thus, for Bacon, in order for the human mind tograsp the truth, it requires freedom from error and doubt, both of which mathematics is able to provide because of its connection to experience. The certifying potential of experience was further developed by Bacon in the sixth part of the Opus Maius, under the name of the first dignity of experimental science (prima prerogativa) (Fisher and Unguru, 1971).

iii. The Physical Relevance of Mathematics

Bacon can be regarded as having been among the first scholars to emphasize the physical relevance of mathematics. Bacon’s rationale for emphasizing the physical relevance of mathematics has epistemic elements, as discussed above, but it also has metaphysical elements, which have to do with the way in which Bacon conceived the structure of the physical world.

Everything that exists in nature, Bacon stated, was brought into existence by two causes, the efficient and the material cause. Every efficient cause, however,

acts through its own force which it produces in the matter subject to it, like the light of the sun produces its force in the air which is the light which is spread out throughout the world from the light of the sun. And this force is called likeness, image, species, and many other names, and this [force] produces substance as well as accident, both spiritual and corporeal […] Thus, agents’ forces like these bring about every operation in this world […] (OM IV, vol. 1, 111).

To understand physical agency brought about by efficient causes, however, requires mathematics because physical operations occur by means of forces, or species, like light, which operates through rays. Not only physical agency but psychic and astrological agency require mathematics as well to understand. For Bacon, light is an instance of physical agency through forces or species following the geometrical rules of reflection and refraction. It is a privileged case of such agency because of its visibility. Herein also lay the reason why the science of light and vision (perspective) is embedded in the theory of the multiplication of species. If a natural philosopher wants to explain natural processes, she must focus on lines of physical action and employ mathematical methods. Natural philosophy must follow the principle of motion and rest, which involves instances of change  and species following geometrical principles (OM IV, vol. 1, 110).

c. Bacon’s Theory of Physical Causation and Perspective

Bacon’s treatises De Multiplicatione Specierum and Perspectiva, comprising the fifth part of the Opus Maius, represent his scientific work at its best. Although Bacon was well-read on all of the new sciences presented in the course of the Latin medieval translation movement, he was most accomplished in the fields of light, vision, and the universal emanation of force. However, the actual extent of his accomplishments in this field has been the subject of a good deal of debate. Both the De Multiplicatione Specierum and the Perspectiva are available in modern critical editions and accompanied by English translations, prepared by David C. Lindberg.

In developing an account of physical causation in his doctrine of the multiplication of species, Bacon stood in a long tradition of philosophical and biblical writers who used light metaphors in different epistemological, metaphysical, and physical contexts. Although unknown during the Middle Ages, Plotinus’ doctrine of emanation—with its physical consequence that all beings radiate likenesses of themselves—had an indirect influence on Bacon’s physical doctrine of the multiplication of species, a physical doctrine of emanation, so to speak (Lindberg 1983, xxxix-xlii). The channels through which Plotinian and Neoplatonic ideas reached Bacon included Augustine, Arabic sources such as al-Kindī’s (d. c. 873) De Radiis and De Aspectibus, Avicebron’s (d. c. 1058) Fons Vitae and the Book of Causes (Liber de Causis) transmitting ideas from Proclus’ Elements of Theology. Next to the newly translated Aristotelian works, other important sources for Bacon’s doctrine of physical causation were treatises on more technical subjects such as Euclid’s Optica, Ptolemy’s Optica, and Alhazen’s De Aspectibus.

Among the first scholars to embrace this body of knowledge was Robert Grosseteste, whose influence on Bacon has been much debated. For Grosseteste’s influence on Bacon see Hackett, 1995 and 1997a. In any case, crucial for both Grosseteste and Bacon in their physical and metaphysical considerations was al-Kindī’s notion that  “every creature in the universe is a source of radiation and the universe itself a vast network of forces” (Lindberg, 1983, xlv). In al-Kindī, both Grosseteste and Bacon found a mathematical and physical analysis of the radiation of force, or physical agency, following the rules of geometrical optics. According to this analysis rays of light spread out by rectilinear propagation, reflection, and refraction. In a similar manner, the radiation of other kinds of species could also be understood along optico-geometrical lines. In comparison to al-Kindī and Grosseteste, Bacon’s achievement consisted in the naturalization of Grosseteste’s physics of light, “itself an outgrowth of al-Kindī’s universal radiation of force.” Bacon took Grosseteste’s doctrine out of its metaphysical and cosmogonical context and modified it to become a doctrine of physical causation (Lindberg, 1983, liv). In other words, in the De Multiplicatione Specierum Bacon brought forth a doctrine with which he was able to explain all kinds of physical causation—optical, astrological, and psychic—and to answer the question of how one physical object was able to affect another physical object even if they are not contiguous.

In Bacon’s view, the technical term species was not to be confused with Porphyry’s universal species . The former denotes the likeness or similitude of any naturally-acting thing, or its “first effect, ” as he called it (DMS, 2). What this implies is that a substance or quality is able to affect its surroundings by sending forth a likeness of itself in all directions unless obstructed—an activity which makes recipients of their likeness like themselves. By this process, natural agents impact others by means of forces bearing the specific nature of the original agent. Yet, this process of causation takes place without the original agent emitting something since this would result in its corruption, a possibility which Bacon excludes. Bacon emphasizes that instead of comprehending the process of the production of species in terms of emission or material emanation, as the ancient atomists did, it should be understood in terms of a transmission “through a natural alteration and bringing out of the potentiality of the matter of the recipient” (DMS, 45). For the physical nature of the species, this meant that they were generated in the recipient matter by a “bringing forth” (eductio), an elicitation “out of the recipient’s matter active potentiality” that already exists there (DMS, 47). In cases in which the agent and the recipient are contiguous, “the active substance of the agent, touching the substance of the recipient without intermediary, can alter, by its active virtue and power, the first part of the recipient it touches. And this action flows into the interior of that part, since the part is not a surface, but a body” (DMS, 52f). In cases in which this “bringing forth” could not be continuous because the agent and the effect are not contiguous, it occurs in a stepwise manner through a medium. In those cases, natural causation takes place in the form of successive generation or multiplication of species along straight or direct, reflected, refracted, twisting, or accidental lines. The species are multiplied step by step, beginning in a small section of a medium contiguous with the original agent, from whence it draws out its likeness in the next adjacent part, and so forth, until finally the last part of the medium ultimately superimposes the nature of the agent on the recipient. In the Perspectiva, the fifth part of the Opus maius, Bacon applied his doctrine of the multiplication of species to the subjects of the propagation of light and vision. Although much of Bacon’s account of vision was borrowed from Alhazen and other predecessors, Bacon synthesized that account into a form that became historically important. Indeed, it remained the standard account of visual theory until the work of Johannes Kepler (d. 1630) (Lindberg, 1997, 265).

In developing his doctrine of natural agency, Bacon drew principally on the optical tradition because he regarded light, acting by means of rays, as a paradigmatic case of physical causation. In fact, he thought of light as a privileged case because of its visibility—the radiation of force being like the sun (OM IV, vol. 1, 111). Inspired by Aristotle, Bacon stated that we know everything through vision, and perspective is the science of vision by means of which one can understand the structure and laws of the universe (OT, chapt. xi, 36f.). Perspective became Bacon’s model science for physical causation and was, compared to all the other sciences, especially significant for human understanding of the world. According to Bacon, because the radiation of light follows the geometrical principles of rectilinear propagation, reflection, and refraction, it employs mathematical methods and involves the possibility of geometrical demonstration, what Bacon considered an “experiment”; moreover, it is a subdivision of mathematics. As far as Bacon’s accomplishments in this field are concerned, it is commonly agreed that he was one of the leading Western proponents of the doctrine of the multiplication of species. It was Bacon, “more than any other author in the Latin world, who taught Europeans how to think about light, vision, and the emanation of force ”  (Lindberg, 1997, 244).

d. Experimental Science

Following Aristotle, Bacon held that “all humans by nature desire to know” and are naturally drawn towards the beauty of wisdom and carried away by their love for it. Bacon emphasized that to ensure success in learning, it is necessary to first inquire into the method best suited for it, as there are better and worse ways to proceed in the sciences. In his Compendium Studii Philosophiae (CSP), Bacon distinguished between three ways of acquiring knowledge—knowledge through authority, reason, and experience—and he made it clear that not all three ways are of equal value. Neither authority nor reason are sufficient for knowledge because reliance on authority alone yielded belief but not understanding, while reason alone could not distinguish between true sentences and sentences having only the appearance of knowledge (CSP, ch. i, 396f). According to Bacon, achieving knowledge requires three things: (1) to heed the structure of the scientific material and to begin with what is first, easier, and more general then proceed to what is later, more difficult, and more particular, (2) to proceed using the clearest possible words without causing confusion, and (3) to reach a level of certainty that leaves behind all doubt. For this, Bacon considered it crucial to employ experience, and, in regard to the order of learning, to precede experience with mathematics. Thus, the only way for the human mind to arrive at the full truth, and to rest in the contemplation of truth, is through experience, a subjective comprehension based on sense perception. Bacon believed that experimental science (scientia experimentalis) was virtually unknown to the “rank and file of students;” thus he thought it necessary to present to the Pope its “powers and properties.” Bacon thus laid out his theory of experiential knowledge in the sixth part of Opus Maius, presenting scientia experimentalis as the penultimate science, second only to moral philosophy (OM VI, vol. 2, 172).

Many of Bacon’s writings bear witness to his concern not only for the content of knowledge (that is, the available material), but also the quality of the knowledge acquired (ideally, conclusions should be held in a manner that penetrates and reassures the soul and leaves it in a state of certainty and free of doubt). Thus, when Bacon said that “[…] nothing can be sufficiently known without experience,” he meant to emphasize the role that individual sense perception (and especially vision) plays in the process of learning. (OM VI, vol. 2, 167) For Bacon, learning denotes not only the process of the acquisition of knowledge, but also the process of the restoration of wisdom that was given by God at the beginning of time and subsequently lost through sin (see Section 2a). Therefore, experiential knowledge is of fundamental importance in Bacon’s project of the reform of studies. Its importance and utility extended far beyond the theoretical sphere, encompassing progress in applied science and technology, and ideally leading to broad improvements in both Church and State.

i. Experience and Experiment

The meaning of the Latin term experimentum is ‘test’ or ‘trial.’ Bacon used this term to cover a variety of testing practices, such as first-hand and second-hand sensory experience and the inner, spiritual experience of divine illumination. Experimentum also was used to refer to various kinds of practical knowledge that are more or less connected to empirical practice. The notion of experience or experiments as a basis for induction, that is, for inferences based on observation, was familiar to Bacon, but in the context of advancing scientific understanding he did not seem to attach much importance to it. In his attempts to discover the cause of the rainbow, however, there are some inductive elements (Fisher and Unguru, 1971, 376).

In his concept of scientia experimentalis, Bacon did not only consider experience through external senses, through vision, for example. His understanding was firmly grounded within the Augustinian tradition in affirming another kind of experience next to those provided by the external senses. Experience that consists in “internal illumination” (OM VI, vol. 2, 169). For Bacon, experience through the external senses does not completely suffice to provide certainty in regard to physical bodies, “because of its difficulty,” and it does not achieve anything in the realm of spiritual things. The ancient patriarchs and prophets received their scientific knowledge by way of this divinely granted internal illumination. Thus, experience-based knowledge according to Bacon was twofold: philosophical and divine. The philosophical was rooted in external senses and the divine was rooted in divine inspiration occurring internally (OM VI, vol. 2, 169-172).

ii. The Three Prerogatives of Experimental Science

The goal of the major section of the sixth part of the Opus Maius was to outline the different dimensions of the value and utility of scientia experimentalis. In his theory, Bacon explicitly and carefully distinguished three different “prerogatives” or functions of scientia experimentalis, each producing its own peculiar result. Bacon’s usage of the name scientia experimentalis referred not to one but to three different things, each being useful for the restoration of learning, yet in different ways. Scientia experimentalis was both an instrument used within other sciences like mathematics or alchemy and a science in its own right. Scientia experimentalis experientially confirms or refutes the theoretical conclusions of other sciences, first dignity; it provides observations and instruments needed for empirical practice, second dignity, and it actively investigates the secrets of nature, third dignity. Modernly speaking one can say that by dividing scientia experimentalis into three dignities, Bacon acknowledged the difference that exists between science and technology.

The first prerogative or dignity of scientia experimentalis, according to Bacon, was aimed at the conclusions of the other sciences (OM VI, vol. 2, 172-201). With this dignity, Bacon’s goal was not to render conclusions logically consistent with one another, but rather experientially test or challenge theoretical claims to knowledge and thereby aid in the process of attaining doubt-free, certain knowledge. . Thus, in its first dignity, scientia experimentalis puts universal theoretical claims to the test by confronting them with the actual experiential objects. It thereby completes science’s search for truth and certitude. Certitude, in turn, is a function of the way by which knowledge is acquired and describes the state in which the human mind has a direct intuition of an experiential object. According to Bacon, this dignity of scientia experimentalis also includes mathematical conclusions, which cannot be fully known based on demonstrations alone since they lack reference to concrete experiential particulars. In his discussion of the rainbow and the halo in the sixth part of Opus Maius, Bacon gave a detailed illustration of this function of scientia experimentalis. In particular, by referring to observation and the application of the laws of perspective, Bacon attempted to provide a causal account of the appearance of the rainbow (Lindberg, 1966; Hackett, 1997b, 285-306).

The second prerogative also situates scientia experimentalis as an instrument within the other sciences.  Yet it is not related to experience as a source of knowledge or certitude as described in the first dignity. In its second function, experimental knowledge serves the purpose of developing the other speculative sciences to their fullest potential by venturing into the unknown and the occult through experimental practice involving instruments. Scientia experimentalis, for Bacon, becomes a tool utilized in the other sciences through its ability to discover truths hidden in these sciences—truths whose unearthing went beyond the competence of those sciences. For example, although human life and health belong to the science of medicine, scientia experimentalis goes beyond the field of medicine by seeking out means by which to prolong life (OM VI, vol. 2, 202).

In the third prerogative Bacon gave scientia experimentalis the status of a science within its own right, independent of the other sciences. Experimental science investigates the secrets of nature by its own power. Its function includes the acquisition of knowledge of the future, past, and present in which it even exceeds astrology, and the accomplishment of marvelous works such as the manufacturing of antidotes against animal poisons or technologies that could be used in warfare. (OM VI, vol. 2, 215-219)

iii. Bacon as Experimenter

In many respects, Bacon's experimental practice was not as  sophisticated and strategic as his theory of scientia experimentalis.   It is the general verdict arrived at by scholars that Bacon did not live up to his promise of the application of experimental methods. Bacon’s accomplishment as experimenter has been criticized for many reasons including his silence on the concrete question of how to conduct the experiments in practice outlined by him in theory. In regard to perspective, it has been pointed out that while Bacon’s theories were not primarily the result of his own experimental practice, he still engaged in some experimental practice that went beyond simple, everyday observation, like in the case of the rainbow where he performed more complex observations. These observations have been described as “geometrical tests” (Lindberg, 1997, 268-271). Bacon’s experimental practice also encompassed observations that were supposed to supply empirical data requiring explanations in the context of existing theories, for example when employing the rules of refraction to explain the rod that appears bent upon partially being submerged in water. The most usual function of experiment and experience, though, consisted in the verification of theoretical claims made by the other speculative sciences.

e. Alchemy and Medicine

Apart from experimental science, the other science in which Bacon’s practical, secular concerns became manifest was alchemy—the science of the “generation of things” from the four elements. Unsurprisingly, alchemy occupies a very high position in Bacon’s reform of studies. He presented his “alchemical manifesto” (Newman, 1997, 319) as part of the Opus Tertium and at the end of the Opus Minus (OT, ch. xii, 39-43; OMi, 359-389). Apart from the papal opera, there were in addition a few other works dealing with alchemical-medical questions, such as the De Erroribus Medicorum and the Liber Sex Scientiarum in 3° Gradu Sapientie. In Bacon’s judgment, alchemy needed an advocate because natural philosophers and the common run of students were ignorant of the true potential of alchemy. Due to the interconnectedness of the sciences, ignorance of alchemy was to the detriment of speculative and practical medicine, which in turn affected the very general state of human affairs. For Bacon’s views on alchemy see Newman 1997.

Because alchemy was on the blacklist of ecclesiastical authorities, it was necessary for Bacon to carefully qualify his understanding of alchemy and to thoroughly differentiate it from magic. Bacon attempted to do this in his Epistola de Secretis Operibus Artis et Naturae, et de Nullitate Magiae. Against magical practices that relied on the help of evil demons, Bacon argued that alchemy relied on the powers of science, which operated in accordance with nature by artificially employing and directing the potential latent in nature. Bacon argued that the powers of the sciences even surpassed those of nature when in their practice they used natural powers as their instruments. In effect Bacon claimed that alchemical theory would provide the necessary naturalization of seemingly magical natural processes (Epistola de Secretis Operibus, 523).

As was common for his approach in organizing the sciences, Bacon divided alchemy into two branches, one speculative and the other practical. Speculative alchemy teaches the generation of things from the four elements (fire, air, water, and earth). What arises from the elements, Bacon argued, are things like metals, salts, or precious stones, and two types of humors: the “simple” humors (blood, phlegm, and black and yellow bile) and the “compound” humors of the same names. Practical alchemy, on the other hand, applies those theoretical insights for the purposes of, say, manufacturing various items of chemical technology like precious metals or pigments (OT, ch. xii, 40).

The notion that the interplay of the humors directs human vital processes and that the alchemist has the ability to analyze and transmute material substances, based on the belief in the transmutability of the proportions of humors, lead Bacon to call for practical action. He wanted the so-called philosophers’ stone and the universal remedy, Panacea, to be produced with alchemy. In general, he thought alchemy should be applied to medicine, which, during his time, was a “significant novelty” (Newman, 1997, 335). In the course of his alchemical work, Bacon assigned two roles to alchemy in medicine. The first role consisted in purifying ordinary pharmaceuticals, and the second role concerned prolonging human life to its utmost. Bacon believed that the shortness of people’s lives during his time was due not to divine plan, but to bad health regimens. Over time, these regimes had corrupted human complexion. Because this corruption arose from natural causes it was susceptible to natural remedies that would help to reestablish “equal complexion,” that is, a state of incorruptibility where the elemental qualities of a substance existed in perfect harmony according to their virtue and active power.  In Bacon’s mind, nature, with the help of alchemy, could produce the same result by applying appropriate means.

The secular trajectory of Bacon’s reductio artium and his “utilitarian” scientific outlook emerged in  the most pronounced form in Bacon’s work in medical alchemy. Even though Bacon’s attempt to combine alchemy and medicine under the aegis of experimental science did not have a major impact on his contemporaries, “it did at least foreshadow the development of a medical alchemy in the following century” (Newman, 1997, 335).

5. Moral Philosophy

a. General Scope and Nature of Bacon’s Moral Philosophy

Roger Bacon presented his main thoughts and arguments on morality and human moral agency in a piece entitled Moralis Philosophia (MP), which formed the seventh and last part of the Opus Maius (1266–1268). As such, the Moralis Philosophia marked the culmination of Bacon’s proposals on the reform of the studies of language and the sciences commissioned by Pope Clement IV. The Moralis Philosophia is available in a modern critical edition prepared by Eugenio Massa (1953). A short résumé of the main elements of Bacon’s moral philosophy is contained in the Opus Tertium, chapters xiv, xv, and lxxv.

i. Morality and Happiness

Generally speaking, Bacon’s moral reflections were built on the assumption that the end or goal of human life (finis hominis) is happiness and that human moral practice in the form of virtuous agency is a decisive factor in humans’ attainment of happiness. For a human being, the proper way to live is in a human manner and, as Bacon said, “virtue is the life of a human being” (MP III, §§1-4, 50f). Bacon understood happiness to be synonymous with salvation and believed philosophy and faith are both indispensable for its attainment. On the nature of happiness, true philosophy and the principles of Christian faith are in complete agreement. Thus the topic around which Bacon’s main practical and normative concerns in moral philosophy revolved was human moral agency. This took three specific forms: (1) human moral practice in relation to God, (2) human moral practice in relation to one’s neighbor in the form of social relations, and (3) human moral practice in relation to persons themselves in the form of virtue or vice. Bacon’s moral philosophy was normative in the sense that it concretely prescribed the details of these relations, and practical in the sense that it exhorted agents to live according to these moral principles and laws (MP I, §4, 4).

Next to the concept of happiness, the idea of the utility of the sciences for humankind was an ever-present concern for Bacon. According to Bacon, all of the sciences presented in the Opus Maius are, in one way or the other, useful for human beings in providing the theoretical and practical means necessary for a better life. The way in which a science is important can be spelled out either in the worldly sense of being able to procure an amelioration of everyday life, or—and in this sense related to the secular and the divine—as contributing to achieving happiness. Since moral philosophy is the only science concerned with morally relevant human agency, and human moral agency is directly related to the attaining of happiness, which is the highest goal or end of human beings, moral philosophy is the highest science. Thus Bacon’s concern with the utility of the sciences was expanded to include a moral dimension insofar as moral philosophy guides humans in virtuous action.

ii. The Place of Moral Philosophy within the Hierarchy of Sciences

Because meritorious human practice is connected to human happiness, it follows that sciences like grammar, mathematics, or geography are not value-neutral activities but crucial instruments in humans’ pursuit of the highest good (summum bonum). Thus within philosophy, moral reflection is a distinct, yet not isolated task, and it informed Bacon’s treatments of language, mathematics, optics and experimental science insofar as it orients them towards human perfection and happiness. In Bacon’s hierarchy of the sciences, moral philosophy is the highest science. Even experimental science, which Bacon favored so much, is only penultimate. Moral philosophy uses the results and conclusions of the other sciences, for example the truths that were established about celestial bodies in astronomy, for its principles and starting points. All other sciences are subordinate to moral philosophy (MP, Part I, §6, 4). While in themselves all the sciences on Bacon’s agenda had their own distinctive subject matters and objects, their shared overall purpose, the improvement of human life, represents a unifying factor.

Another significant feature of Bacon’s conception of moral philosophy concerns the way in which he attempted to solve a problem prominent in the 13th century. Contemporaries were concerned with the ethical value of speculation (theoria), in particular, metaphysics, the speculative science par excellence, and the status of speculative statements about God and spiritual substances. Bacon approached these issues from a teleological, ethical angle. For him, the supreme way of human life consists in moral practice, the highest expression of which is love of God practiced in worship (cultus dei). Although metaphysics and moral philosophy are related in the sense that they share their subject matter,  including subjects like God, immortality, and happiness, they are methodologically distinct. Metaphysics deals with these topics speculatively, that is, in a fundamental manner (principaliter) and in general (in universali), whereas moral philosophy deals with them practically, that is, from the point of view of their concrete practical implications (in particulari). While metaphysics asks whether there is a God or whether the human soul is immortal, moral philosophy assumes the affirmative metaphysical conclusions as its principles in order to deduce from them content related to the particular, concrete sphere of human agency. While for Bacon moral philosophy is completely dependent upon metaphysical speculation, metaphysical speculation is still entirely subordinated to moral philosophy because, from a teleological point of view, speculation ranks lower than moral practice in regard to the highest good and because of the limitations of metaphysical speculation with regard to moral matters. Thus metaphysical speculation is not an end in itself; rather, its end consists in catering to the needs of moral philosophy.  By virtue of its relation to metaphysics, moral philosophy is prevented from diminishing into a mere discrete, action-guiding skill, but rather retains its scientific character (MP, ch. I, 7-9). The reason for the moral philosopher’s competence to amplify metaphysical conclusions, such as those involving creation or the Trinity, was grounded in Bacon’s conviction that philosophers share in divine revelation and illumination (OM II, vol. 3, 44-50). In his answer to the question of the status of speculative statements about the divine, Bacon drew strongly from Avicenna’s conception of the relation between moral philosophy, civil science, and metaphysics, as presented in his final book, Liber de Philosophia Prima.

Bacon perceived no competition between moral philosophy and theology. Bacon stated very clearly that theology, the primary discipline concerned with sacred Scriptures, addresses the same topics as moral philosophy albeit in a different manner, namely “in the faith of Christ” (MP I, §5, 4). According to Bacon, philosophy is not ancillary to theology in the sense that any philosophical endeavor would culminate in theology, as proposed by the contemporary Reduction of Arts to Theology, written by Bacon’s Minister General Bonaventure. Rather, Bacon emphasized that both theology and philosophy are results of divine revelation and illumination. Secondly, philosophy is superior to theology in some respects. for example in matters pertaining to morality and virtue. Therefore theology could not lead humans to salvation without the substantial aid of philosophy. In Bacon’s model of knowledge, the ultimate goals of both theology and philosophy are subordinate to the highest good of a beatific union with God. In relation to philosophy, the object of theology is to amplify the wisdom provided by philosophy by adding the decisive teleological element in regard to human meritorious agency. In Bacon’s view, theology, like moral philosophy, is a practical science, dealing with human salvation “in the faith of Christ.” Philosophy, on the other hand, operates within the limitations of natural reason, rather than “in the faith of Christ.” Although it  informs “our actions in this life and in the other life,” in itself it cannot promote full, future happiness. Philosophical contemplative practice cannot bring about happiness or salvation (MP I, §2, 3).

iii. Practical Sciences and Human Practice

The manner in which Bacon reflected on the concept of human “practice” in the beginning of the MP suggests that the concept “practical science” was very important for Bacon’s philosophy. The way in which Bacon used the term bears modern connotations insofar as for him it implied the notions of utility and power for humans—for example, to improve or to ameliorate human lives in view of diseases or the process of aging. As Bacon pointed out, “some sciences are active and operative […]. They are about artificial and natural works, and consider the truths of things and scientific works that relate to the speculative intellect” (MP I, §2, 3). Thus, in Bacon’s understanding, a practical science had secular relevance in that it has the capacity of explaining and producing things through speculative efforts. This idea of practical he associated especially with experimental science, as described in great detail in the sixth part of the Opus Maius. However, Bacon further qualified the notion of human practice by pointing towards the relevance it had for human life in the other world, namely life after death. In this sense, the term practical acquired a narrower meaning.

According to Bacon, the term practical refers to a kind of human practice that has a connection to humans’ highest end (finis hominis) and to becoming good, to their acquiring the virtues of justice or modesty. These “works” of humans constitute moral agency properly speaking and represent the works by virtue of which characters or souls are judged as good or evil. Those works are works of moral conduct (opera moris). They consist in the performance of what is considered good or evil and are directed by the practical intellect intending and striving for the good. Accordingly, a practical science, taken in the narrower sense of the term, is a science of human action from the point of view of the distinction between good and evil, virtuous and vicious, and happiness and misery in the next life. Thus, in a wider sense, the term practical refers to human works, and practical science refers to the sciences directing their effort towards works, activity, and production. Yet, as Bacon emphasized, taken in a narrower sense, as in the context of moral philosophy, practical refers strictly to works of moral conduct as related to the practical intellect and human will (MP I, § 3, 3).

iv. The Functional Division of Moral Philosophy

The overall goal of moral philosophy, according to Bacon, is practical and directed towards human moral agency. With regard to the general structure of moral philosophy (sensu stricto), Bacon distinguished between two branches, a speculative or theoretical branch (speculativa), and a practical branch (practica). The former deals with subjects in a speculative manner—concerning, originally, metaphysical truths that have moral implications relating to the existence of God or God’s unity and trinity, as well as laws and virtues.  The practical branch, on the other hand, seeks engagement in human affairs. Under this branch the moral philosopher is concerned with active moral work, namely with moral persuasion, be that of unbelievers or the morally “paralyzed,” as Bacon describes the Christian whose will is corrupt or whose nature is too irascible to be made continent easily (MP V, §§1-2, 247).

Bacon likened this “division of labor” between the speculative and the practical parts of moral philosophy to the art of medicine which, like moral philosophy and all the other sciences, has a speculative and a practical branch. For Bacon, the practical part of moral philosophy is related to the speculative in a similar manner as, in medicine. The practical part of medicine isconcerned with the active healing of the sick and the preservation of health,) and is related to the theoretical part, concerning which concerns what health is, which diseases and symptoms there are, or what their remedies are. The main difference between both parts consists in the kind of knowledge the theoretically and practically versed expert possesses. While the theorist’s knowledge is essentially book knowledge,  consisting of generalized facts and second-hand authority, the practitioner’s knowledge is skill-based, rooted in first-hand experience with particular cases.  These experiences produce knowledge that allows for practical, read, operational, application to “induce humans to moral action.” According to Bacon, both the speculative and practical branches of moral philosophy have as common subject matters those subjects that are practical (operabilia) and are the highest truths about God and worship, eternal life, laws of justice and peace, and the virtues. The practice of moral philosophy, in Bacon’s understanding, can be likened to a kind of therapy, a spiritual-psychological healing, in which the patient (the human soul) is aided in the preservation of spiritual health and healed in case of spiritual disease (sin) (MP V, §§4-11, 248f). With regard to the division of moral philosophy, one can say that Bacon’s overall motto followed the famous Aristotelian principle from the second book of the Nicomachean Ethics, according to which the end of examining questions of virtue and happiness is not pursued for its own sake but rather in order “to become good.”

Bacon subsequently divided each of the two branches of moral philosophy into three sub-branches. The three parts of the speculative branch comprise the first three parts of the Moralis Philosophia. The first part presents a kind of “metaphysical groundwork or morals,” listing morally relevant metaphysical principles, like the existence of God, from which Bacon argued that it is possible to “unfold” (explicare) or expound any implied normative moral content. The second part of the speculative branch of moral philosophy deals with morality insofar as it pertains to the relations between the individuals and their fellow beings; this part, however, remains very brief, consisting mostly of quotations from Avicenna’s Metaphysics, outlining a structure of social life. Lastly, in the third part Bacon dealt with the topic of virtues and vices, predominantly by quoting from and recounting the moral works of the ancient Roman Stoic Seneca and also including some Cicero. Bacon had a special appreciation for Seneca. He considered Seneca’s moral teaching on virtues and vices as superior to the teaching of Christian thinkers (MP III.5, §1, 132). Bacon’s own account of the virtues and vices was influenced by both Aristotle’s and Stoic views on virtue. He adopted the Aristotelian doctrine of virtues of character being a mean and combined it with the Stoic doctrine of affects.  Accordingly, Bacon greatly emphasized tranquility. Without tranquility of mind, one could not tolerate adversities with ease or attain happiness.  Bacon also devoted particular attention to the vice of wrath. It has been argued that this part of Moralis Philosophia was composed as a moral handbook for the Prince and Prelate, advising the Pope about the existence and nature of Seneca’s Dialogues, which had been unknown north of the Alps until 1266 (Hackett, 1997, 407). This circumstance again illustrates the practical trajectory of Bacon’s philosophy, where “practical” is to be understood both in the sense of utility and of moral persuasiveness.

The “therapeutic” or practical task of moral philosophy, on the other hand, is contained in parts four to six of the Moralis Philosophia. All of these parts share the goal of helping to “induce humans to moral action,” that is, to persuade people of the morals contained in the works of secular philosophers, mainly Aristotle and Seneca and in the works of the Christian tradition. Bacon divided the three sub-branches of philosophy in accordance with their three distinct goals: (1) faith (MP part four), (2) moral practice (MP part five), and (3) forensic judgment (MP part six). Parts four to six of the Moralis Philosophia were “practical” in the sense that in each case, the “patient” or addressee is to be persuaded of either (1) the credibility of the right, Christian law (lex christiana), (2) the love and fulfillment of the law once she believed it, or (3) the “right” side in a complex legal case. Thus moral philosophy in its three practical sub-branches deals, according to Bacon, with different kinds of “patients”—Christians as well as Infidels. It employs different practical methods, including rhetorical and poetical arguments, in order to prove the validity of the religion and persuade people of it.

b. Moral Philosophy in the Service of Human Moral Agency

Bacon intended moral reflection to serve the salvific interests of humankind. He conceived of it, as we have seen, as “practical” in a double sense. On one hand, moral philosophy is human moral practice dealt with from a speculative point of view, consisting in the contemplation and proof or moral truths and ultimately directed towards practical guidance. On the other hand, moral philosophy is practical in that it involves the active effort to induce people to act morally (opus morale) by employing rhetorical and poetical arguments. The addressees of moral persuasion are, for Bacon, non-Christians and those Christians suffering from mental insanity or those who are morally “paralyzed” because of a corrupt will. In either of those cases, Bacon’s eye was directed towards human happiness and the religious, social, and personal implications of human moral agency for attaining that happiness. Because Bacon understood human practice to be establishing a relation to God through worship, to others in society, and to the individual self, being good for Bacon means to act virtuously in all of these relations. The purpose and utility of the practical branch of moral philosophy consists in producing the corresponding attitudes towards God, one’s neighbor, and oneself through the use of rhetorical and poetical arguments. Hence, moral persuasion was divided according to what pertains to the moral practice of faith (credendum), action (operandum), and correct judgment (recte iudicandum), and in this consists its service to humankind (MP V.2, §8, 251).

i. The Conversion of Non-Christians

The fourth part of Moralis Philosophia, which deals with the conversion of non-Christians, has a close connection to the fourth part of Opus Maius, on mathematics.  Bacon relied on the astrological theories he previously outlined in his mathematical reflections in Opus Maiusto create an account of the different religious sects (sectae) in Moralis Philosophia.. The systematic background for applying mathematics to religious matters was based on Bacon’s theory of science, according to which all sciences are related on a deeper genealogical level insofar as they all have divine origin and thus share the goal of serving or facilitating humanity’s pursuit of the highest good. Furthermore, according to Bacon, the speculative sciences, directed at contemplating truths, are subordinate to the practical sciences, which aim at the good. The good as an end of action is superior to truth as the end of speculation. Bacon defined this hierarchical relationship in terms of utility (MP V.2, §5, 251).

For Bacon, the mathematical sciences, of which astronomy-astrology is one, are useful in secular as well as divine matters. For theology, for example, Bacon briefly describes seven areas for the application of mathematics, including the location of hell and paradise (geography) or the course of human history since creation (chronology) (OM IV, 175ff). With regard to astronomy in general, it had been a widely circulated idea among medieval thinkers that astronomy is of immediate relevance to the human situation—and thus to moral philosophy—because, as was generally accepted at that time, the motions and natures of celestial bodies by means of rays affected sublunar processes and bodies. According to Bacon, judicial astronomy (astrology) in particular is useful. With respect to the present, judicial astronomy indicated that and what kind of peculiar moral influence each planet has on terrestrial animate and inanimate bodies. He believed this knowledge was useful for the work of moral persuasion (OM IV, vol. 1, 253-269). Thus moral and sociological issues such as temperament or character, forms of social organization and kinds of rulership, were held by Bacon to be dependent on astronomical constellations. For example, the constellations of Jupiter and Mars had religious significance in that they pointed to the supremacy of Christian faith or the coming of the Antichrist. Bacon not only believed individuals to be affected by constellations or climate, but whole communities as well. Thus the true astronomer can make conjectures based on manners and customs, which in turn are dependent on temperament and climate. Bacon believed this was why moral philosophy should consider astronomy-astrology in its work of converting infidels.

In accordance with astronomical-astrological findings, Bacon stated in his MP that there are six main sects, or social constitutions (lex), among which he listed Sarracens, Tartars, Pagans, Idolaters, Jews, and Christians (MP IV, §4, 189). With regard to the practical task of moral philosophy, Bacon considered its first goal to be the conversion of these sects, the “bending of the souls” of non-Christians so that they would receive and believe the truths of Christianity. Bacon held that the means by which they should be persuaded of the truth of Christianity were those common to all people. Rather than appeal to Christian authorities, the arguments employed should appeal to natural reason. Bacon recommended this conversion through language, essentially rhetoric, as being worth more than any war or “conversion through the sword” (OM III, vol. 2, 120-122).

ii. Moral Works and Eloquence

From Bacon’s point of view, the human need of moral persuasion was evident not only from contact of Christians with non-Christians, but also in the corrupt state of society. Bacon believed societal corruption was a reflection of curricular deficiencies, the deficiency being that they were taught grammar and formal logic rather than rhetoric and poetics. Bacon acknowledged that moral works—consisting of the acquisition of virtuous character traits, willing compliance with civil laws, and religious worship—were very difficult to achieve.  Indeed, he considered them much more difficult than the grasp of scientific subjects (MP V.3, §2, 254). The two reasons for human obtuseness in relation to moral works are, first, that moral works in themselves have a higher degree of difficulty than the scientific empirical subjects because of their being insensible, that is, intelligible only. Secondly, and more importantly, human will is corrupt and does not enjoy the execution of such works. Human will is drawn to sensible and temporal pleasures more than to eternal and insensible pleasures. Our will (affectus), Bacon added, resembles a paralytic who cannot perceive the delicious food placed in front of him. Failure to act morally is thus a failure of intention rather than cognitive inability. Since virtue and happiness are more important than individual scientific advancement and since some people must be persuaded of moral action, Bacon assigned the task of moral persuasion to the practical branch of moral philosophy.

For effective moral persuasion, Bacon identified a kind of “speech capable of swaying the human mind,” a way of speaking to people that takes into account basic facts of human psychology. Because moral agency depends on factors such as desire, will, motivation, and prudence—which are all associated with the practical intellect—the arguments employed in moral persuasion must be capable of appealing to the practical intellect and strong enough to remedy against “moral paralysis.” The arguments not only had to be taught but had to captivate listeners’ attention and arouse in them love for the good (MP V.2, §1, 250). In the process of identifying the adequate means for moral persuasion, Bacon excluded the two traditional, scientific forms of argument: dialectical and demonstrative arguments. Despite acceding to the view that only demonstrative arguments move the intellect towards knowledge of truths, Bacon held that the fact of being moved by means of argument towards knowing the truth about a subject is not sufficient for inducing humans to love the good and to act in accordance with it. For Bacon, arousing a love for the good that would result in action requires a kind of truth-bearing argument that appeals to the practical intellect. Human emotions and desires must participate rather than the speculative intellect, which is limited only to grasping truths and not involved in moral practice. The proper argument in the context of human moral and civil affairs engendered action. Thus, according to Bacon, moral persuasion was inseparable from the principles of eloquence through which a hearer was rendered docile, benevolent, and attentive (MP V.2, §8, 251). By means of pleasing words, a hearer’s soul can be carried away and swayed towards the good. These “pleasing words” encompass, for example, rhetoric and poetics as found in Horace. In matters pertaining to justice, the virtues, happiness, and faith, in which the appeal to emotions, desires, and hope is so decisive, Bacon believed that rhetoric and poetics are much more appropriate than demonstrations or dialectical arguments. For these reasons, as Bacon pointed out to the Pope, the disappearance of rhetoric and poetics from the curricula and the inability of students to compose such arguments posed a problem to society as a whole (OM I, vol. III, 33).

iii. Rhetoric and Poetics as Branches of Moral Philosophy

In identifying rhetorical and poetical arguments as the proper instruments for moral persuasion, Bacon did not work in vacuo but was inspired by Greek and Arabic sources as well by Augustine’s De Doctrina Christiana and connected with this by the practice of preaching and Scriptural hermeneutics.

For Bacon, Aristotle was the undisputed master of rhetoric and poetics. He explicitly credited Aristotle’s brief remarks in the Nichomachean Ethics (1094b, 19-27), stating that the moral philosopher should use rhetoric rather than geometric proof. In the same breath, however, he lamented that current knowledge of both Aristotle’s Rhetoric and Poetics was lacking. The first complete translation of the Poetics was prepared in the 1280s by William Moerbecke. Without direct knowledge of Aristotle’s Poetics, Bacon had to rely on Averroes’ Commentary on the Poetics.

By comparison, Bacon regarded the Ciceronian Rhetoric (De Inventione and the pseudo-Ciceronian Rhetorica ad Herenium) as deficient in practical matters because it was restricted to cases of forensic oratory (MP, V.2, §7, 251). Apart from Aristotle and Augustine, another important reference for Bacon that demonstrated the connection between rhetoric and ethical and civil concerns was the Arabic tradition of writings, including Avicenna’s Logic, Algazel’s Treatise on Logic, and especially al-Farabi’s De Scientiis, chapter five (De Scientia Civili et Scientia Legis et Scientia Elocutionis) (CM, 16f; Rosier-Catach, 1998).  Bacon’s presentation and commendation of rhetoric and poetics can be regarded as an important historical contribution. Bacon not only criticized their omission from university curricula but also defended them against the charges of sophistry. Instead of counting rhetoric and poetics as part of the Trivium, he situated their use and utility within the context of moral philosophy for the purpose of moral persuasion. In a truly original manner, Bacon combined two distinct spheres of discourse, namely the artistic milieu represented by the Arabic tradition with the theological tradition represented in Augustine.  He also sowed the seeds for a significant step in the history of rhetoric and poetics, which consisted of acknowledging that while the principles of teaching how to compose rhetorical arguments are situated within logic, the particular use of rhetoric is a function of moral philosophy (rhetorica docens and utens) (OT, ch. lxxv, 308). In subsequent 13th century discussion, Giles of Rome further developed this potential of Aristotelian rhetoric in relation to ethical matters in his Commentary on the Rhetoric (1280s).

As far as the particulars of Bacon’s conception of rhetoric are concerned, he proposed a division of rhetoric corresponding to the threefold division of the practical branch of moral philosophy into faith, action, and correct judgment. For each kind of persuasion, there is a corresponding rhetorical technique (triplex flexus) (MP V.2, §7, 251). In the case of faith and the true religion, the adequate kind of persuasion involves assent and proof. While in cases of correct judgment, the kind of rhetoric needed is forensic oratory, which is based on Cicero’s rhetoric. These two parts Bacon regarded as “rhetoric absolutely speaking.”  Yet “swaying” people toward moral action that avoids evil and pursues the good requires stronger remedies. The kind of argument to be used, Bacon said, is properly called “poetic argument.” Thus poetics, according to Bacon, represents the third kind of rhetorical argument and thereby forms an integral part of moral philosophy (MP V.3, §6f., 254f). However, as Bacon pointed out, not all poetry is commendable. There are poets, like Ovidius, whose use of poetically skillful speech incite frivolity rather than virtue, and who, in a certain sense, misuse eloquence by reducing it to delectation. In comparison, the duty of a rhetorician is not to only please but to teach and to sway. The criterion according to which one can distinguish between the good and the shady poets is whether the respective poet only amuses or whether his poetry goes beyond amusement to sway people to good rather than to frivolous action. Poetry’s truthfulness and commendability consist in its practical usefulness.

All three kinds of rhetoric, as Bacon presented them, appeal to the practical intellect and are grounded in the idea that through “powerful speech” a speaker is able to make contact with a listener on some emotional level. The difference between the first two kinds of rhetoric, forensic rhetoric and rhetoric used in situations of religious persuasion, and the third kind, moral persuasion that engendered action, is one of style. Bacon distinguished between three styles: humble, moderate, and grand style. He placed most emphasis on the grand style and ascribed it to poetics because poetics involves “speaking of great and magnificent things.” By using the grand style, poetical argument moves the listener affectively and effectively to moral action (MP V.3, §11f, 256). For efficiency’s sake, Bacon insisted that grandiloquence must dominate in poetics. He also advocated mixing the styles, since moral persuasion also entails moral education and a variety of styles aid in not letting tediousness slip in. Bacon explained that the grand style involved an analogical (similitudo) use of language, illustrating it by giving examples. A knowledge of the properties of things, like light for example, broadens the orator’s semantic range of words and augments the moral message conveyed through argument. A sinner who after penance reverts to sin, as Bacon borrowed from the New Testament, is like “a dog which returns to his own vomit.” The veracity of such kinds of arguments, is not grounded in the properties of things: a person is obviously not a dog. Rather, the statements made in analogical arguments are true by way of similitude, comparison, and analogy and true for the purpose of persuasion (MP V.3, §16f, 257). In suggesting this approach in using language for moral persuasion, Bacon relied on principles of Scriptural hermeneutics. An accurate interpretation of the spiritual meaning of Scripture presupposes an accurate understanding of the literal text, which, in turn, presupposes an understanding of the natural world. In other words, knowledge of nature is subordinate to and useful in theology as well as in moral philosophy. In addition to using the grand style, Bacon suggested including into the repertoire of moral persuasion not only linguistic means of “moving the ears” but sensitivity to the nature and situation of the respective audience. Rhetoricians should be mindful of “movement of the mind and appropriate bodily gesture” (MP V.3, §20, 258). Thus practical moral discourse is capable of effectively touching human sentiment. Bacon’s reflections took into account the different dimensions of practical moral discourse, ranging from rhythm and intonation over content to the body language of the speaker.

6. Conclusion

Many of Roger Bacon’s works still require critical editions and systematic and historical examination, throwing a wrench into any attempt at a final conclusion about his accomplishments in philosophy. Perhaps because of this circumstance, perhaps because of the brilliance of some of his educational ideas, or perhaps because of his strategic scientific vision, which always aimed at the improvement of human life, his scientific legacy continues to draw the attention of intellectual historians—even if Bacon did not appeal to his own contemporaries.

7. References and Further Reading

a. Bibliographies

  • Alessio, Franco, “Un secolo di studi su Ruggero Bacone (1848-1957),” Revista critica de storia della filosofia 14 (1959), 81-102.
  • Little, Arthur G., “Roger Bacon’s Works with reference to The Manuscripts and Printed Editions,” in Little, A.G., Roger Bacon: Essays Contributed by Various Writers on the Occasion of the Commemoration of the Seventh Centenary of His Birth (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1914), 373-426.
  • Hackett, Jeremiah and Maloney, Thomas S., “A Roger Bacon Bibliography (1957-1985),” New Scholasticism 61 (1987), 184-207.
  • Maloney, Thomas S., “A Roger Bacon Bibliography (1985-1995),” in Roger Bacon and the Sciences. Commemorative Essays (Studien und Texte zur Geistesgeschichte des Mittelalters, vol. 57), ed. Jeremiah Hackett (Leiden: Brill, 1997), 395-403.
  • Hackett, Jeremiah, “The Published Works of Roger Bacon,” Vivarium 35,2 (1997), 315-320. Contains also an updated list of manuscripts.

b. Primary Sources

Below is a list of Bacon’s major works in chronological order with English translations of the titles. For a complete list of Bacon’s published works, consult Jeremiah Hackett’s bibliography.

i. 1240s–1250s

  • Questiones supra undecimum Prime philosophie Aristotelis (Metaphysica XII), ed Robert Steele (with Ferdinand Marie Delorme), Fasc. 7, 1926, in Opera hactenus inedita Rogeri Baconi, 16 Fascicules, ed. Robert Steele (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1905/1909-1941). [Questions on the Eleventh Book of Aristotle’s First Philosophy] (Cited hereafter by Fasc. Number)
  • Questiones supra libros quatuor Physicorum Aristotelis, ed. Ferdinand Marie Delorme (with Robert Steele), Fasc. 8, 1928. [Questions on the Four Books of Aristotle’s Physics]
  • Questiones supra libros Prime philosophie Aristotelis (Metaphysica I, II, V-X), ed. Robert Steele (with Ferdinand Marie Delorme), Fasc. 10, 1930. [Questions on Aristotle’s First Philosophy]
  • Questiones altere supra libros Prime philosophie Aristotelis (Metaphysica I-IV), ed Robert Steele (with Ferdinand Marie Delorme), Fasc. 11, 1932. [Alternate questions on Aristotle’s First Philosophy]
  • Questiones supra librum De causis, ed. Robert Steele, Fasc. 12, 1935. [Questions on The Book of Causes]
  • Questiones supra libros octo Physicorum Aristotelis, ed. Ferdinand Marie Delorme (with Robert Steele), Fasc. 13, 1935. [Questions on the Eight Books of Aristotle’s Physics]
  • Liber de sensu et sensato and Summa de Sophismatibus and Distinctionibus, ed. Robert Steele, Fasc. 14, 1937. [On the Book on Sense and What is Sensed and Summary of Sophisms and Distinctions]
  • Summa Grammatica, ed. Robert Steele, Fasc. 15, 1940. [Summary of Grammar]
  • Summulae dialectices. I: De termino. II: De enuntiatione. III: De argumentatione, ed. Alain de Libera, in Archives d’Histoire Doctrinale et Littéraire du Moyen-Âge 53 (1986), 139-289 (I-II); 54 (1987), 171-278 (III). [Summary of Dialectics]

ii. 1250s–1268

  • De multiplicatione specierum and De speculis comburentibus, in David C. Lindberg, Roger Bacon’s Philosophy of Nature: A Critical Edition, with English Translation, Introduction and Notes, of De multiplicatione specierum and De speculis comburentibus(Oxford: Clarendon Press 1983). [On the Multiplication of Species and On Burning Mirrors]
  • The ‘Opus maius’ of Roger Bacon, 3 vols., ed. John Henry Bridges (Oxford, 1900). Reprint: Frankfurt: Minerva, 1964. [Major Work]
  • Opus maius, part three: K.M. Fredborg, Lauge Nielsen, and Jan Pinborg (eds.), “An Unedited Part of Roger Bacon’s ‘Opus maiusDe signis,’” Traditio 34 (1978), 75-136. [On Signs, fragment of Opus maius, part three]
  • Opus maius, part five: David C. Lindberg, Roger Bacon and the Origins of Perspectiva in the Middle Ages: A Critical Edition and English Translation of Bacon’s Perspectiva with Introduction and Notes (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1996).
  • Opus maius, part seven: Rogeri Baconis Moralis Philosophia, ed. Eugenio Massa (Padua/Zurich: Thesaurus mundi, 1953). [Moral philosophy, critical edition with Latin introduction]
  • Opus minus, ed. John Sherren Brewer, in Fr. Rogeri Bacon Opera quaedam hactenus inedita, ed. John Sherren Brewer (London: Longman, Green, Longman & Roberts, 1859). Reprint: Nendeln/Lichtenstein: Kraus, 1965, 313-389. [Minor Work]
  • Opus tertium, ed. J.S. Brewer, in Fr. Rogeri Bacon Opera quaedam hactenus inedita, ed. J. S. Brewer (London: Longman, Green, Longman & Roberts, 1859). Reprint: Nendeln/Lichtenstein: Kraus, 1965, 3-310. [Third Work]
  • Part of the Opus tertium of Roger Bacon, including a Fragment Now Printed for the First Time, ed. Arthur George Little (Aberdeen: Aberdeen University Press, 1912). Reprint, Farnborough, U.K.: Gregg Press, 1966.
  • Opus maius, Opus minus, Opus tertium (Introduction): Epistola ad Clementem IV papam, in Franics Aidan Gasquet (Cardinal), “An Unpublished Fragment of a Work by Roger Bacon,” English Historical Review 12 (1894), 495-517. [Letter to Pope Clement IV]

iii. 1268–1292

  • Liber primus communium naturalium, parts 1 and 2, ed. Robert Steele, Fasc. 2, 1905. [First Book on What is Common to Natural Things]
  • Liber primus communium naturalium, parts 3 and 4, ed. Robert Steele, Fasc. 3, 1911. [First Book on What is Common to Natural Things]
  • Liber secundus communium naturalium (De celestibus), ed. Robert Steele, Fasc. 4, 1913. [Second Book on What is Common to Natural Things]
  • Compendium studii philosophiae, in Fr. Rogeri Bacon Opera quaedam hactenus inedita, ed. J. S. Brewer (London: Longman, Green, Longman & Roberts, 1859). Reprint: Nendeln/Lichtenstein: Kraus, 1965, 393-519. [Summary of the Study of Philosophy]
  • Epistola fratris Rogerii Baconis de Secretis Operibus Artis et Naturae, et de Nullitate Magiae, in Fr. Rogeri Bacon Opera quaedam hactenus inedita, ed. J. S. Brewer (London: Longman, Green, Longman & Roberts, 1859). Reprint: Nendeln/Lichtenstein: Kraus, 1965, 523-551. [Letter of Brother Roger on the Secret Works of Art and Nature, and on the Uselessness of Magic]
  • Communia Mathematica, parts 1 and 2, ed. Robert Steele, Fasc. 16, 1940. [On What is Common to Mathematical Things]
  • Geometria Speculativa, ed. A. George Molland, in Vestigia mathematica. Studies in Medieval and Early Modern Mathematics in Honour of H.L.L. Busard (Amsterdam: Rodopi, 1993), 265-303. (An edition with English translation of the continuation of theCommunia Mathematica not printed in the Steele-edition) [Theoretical Geometry]
  • Secretum secretorum cum Glossis et Notulis, ed. Robert Steele, Fasc. 5, 1920. [The Book of the Secret of Secrets with Glosses and Notes (of Roger Bacon)]
  • De erroribus medicorum, ed. A.G. Little & E. Withington, Fasc. 9, 1928, 150-171.
  • Antidotarius, ed. A.G. Little & E. Withington, Fasc. 9, 1928, 103-119.
  • Grammatica graeca and Grammatica hebraica (The Greek Grammar of Roger Bacon and a Fragment of His Hebrew Grammar), ed. Edmund Nolan and S.A. Hirsch (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1902). (Exact dating of the two grammars not determined)
  • Compendium studii theologiae, Edition and Translation with Introduction and Notes by Thomas S. Maloney (Studien und Texte zur Geistesgeschichte des Mittelalters, 20), (Leiden: Brill, 1988). [Summary of the Study of Theology]

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  • Maloney, Thomas S.,  “The Semiotics of Roger Bacon,” Medieval Studies 45 (1983), 120-154. (1983b)
  • Maloney, Thomas S.,  “Roger Bacon on Equivocation,” Vivarium 22 (1984), 85-112.
  • Maloney, Thomas S.,  “Is the De doctrina Christiana the Source for Bacon’s Semiotics,” in Reading and Wisdom: The De doctrina Christiana of Augustine in the Middle Ages, ed. Edward D. English (Notre Dame and London: University of Notre Dame Press, 1995), 126-42.
  • Maloney, Thomas S.,  “The Extreme Realism of Roger Bacon,” Review of Metaphysics 38 (1985), 807-837.
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Author Information

Pia Antolic-Piper
James Madison University
U. S. A.

Aquinas: Metaphysics

aquinasMetaphysics is taken by Thomas Aquinas to be the study of being qua being, that is, a study of the most fundamental aspects of being that constitute a being and without which it could not be. Aquinas’s metaphysical thought follows a modified but general Aristotelian view. Primarily, for Aquinas, a thing cannot be unless it possesses an act of being, and the thing that possesses an act of being is thereby rendered an essence/existence composite. If an essence has an act of being, the act of being is limited by that essence whose act it is. The essence in itself is the definition of a thing; and the paradigm instances of essence/existence composites are material substances (though not all substances are material for Aquinas; for example, God is not). A material substance (say, a cat or a tree) is a composite of matter and form, and it is this composite of matter and form that is primarily said to exist. In other words, the matter/form composite is predicated neither of, nor in, anything else and is the primary referent of being; all other things are said of it. The details of this very rich metaphysical landscape are described below.

Table of Contents

  1. The Nature of Metaphysics
  2. Essence and Existence
  3. Participation
  4. Substance and Accident
  5. Matter and Form
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. General Studies

1. The Nature of Metaphysics

Saint Thomas, that is, Aquinas, clarifies the nature of metaphysics through ascertaining its particular subject-matter, its field of investigation. In order to ascertain the subject-matter of any particular science, Thomas distinguishes between the different intellectual operations that we use when engaged in some particular scientific endeavor. Broadly speaking, these fall into two categories: the speculative and the practical. Concerning some sciences, the intellect is merely speculative  by contemplating the truth of some particular subject-matter; while concerning other sciences, the intellect is practical, by  ascertaining the truth and seeking to apply. There are thus correspondingly two distinct classes of science: speculative science and practical science. Speculative sciences are those that contemplate truth whereas practical sciences are those that apply truth for some practical purpose. The sciences are then further distinguished through differentiating their various subject-matters.

Insofar as the speculative sciences merely contemplate truth but do not apply it for some practical purpose, the subject-matter of the speculative sciences is that which can be understood to some extent. Working within the Aristotelian tradition, Thomas holds that something is understood when it is separated from matter and is necessary to thing in some respect. For instance, when we understand the nature of a tree, what we understand is not primarily the matter that goes to constitute the tree in question, but what it is to be a tree, or the structuring principle of the matter that so organizes it and specifies it as a tree rather than a plant. Furthermore, assuming our understanding is correct, when we understand a thing to be a tree, we do not understand it to be a dog, or a horse, or a cat. Thus, in our understanding of a tree, we understand that which is necessary for the tree to be a tree, and not of anything that is not a tree. Hence, our understanding of a thing is separated from its matter and is necessary to it in some respect. Now, what is in motion is not necessary, since what is in motion can change. Thus, the degree to which we have understood something is conditional upon the degree to which it is separated from matter and motion. It follows then that speculative objects, the subject-matter of the speculative-sciences, insofar as they are what are understood, will be separated from matter and motion to some degree. Any distinctions that obtain amongst speculative objects will in turn signify distinctions amongst the sciences that consider those objects; and we can find distinctions amongst speculative objects based upon their disposition towards matter and motion.

There are three divisions that can apply to speculative objects, thereby permitting us to differentiate the sciences that consider such objects: (i) there is a class of speculative objects that are dependent on matter and motion both for their being and for their being understood, for instance, human beings cannot be without matter, and they cannot be understood without their constituent matter (flesh and bones); (ii) there is a class of speculative objects that depend on matter and motion for their being, but not for their being understood, for instance, we can understand lines, numbers, and points without thereby understanding the matter in which they are found, yet such things cannot be without matter; (iii) there is a class of speculative objects that depend on matter and motion neither for their being nor for their being understood.

Given these three classes of speculative objects, the speculative sciences that consider them can be enumerated accordingly: (i) physical science considers those things that depend on matter and motion both for their being and for their being understood; (ii) mathematics considers those things that depend on matter and motion for their being but not for their being understood; (iii) metaphysics or theology deals with those things that depend on matter and motion neither for their being nor for their being understood. Before going on to consider the subject-matter of metaphysics in a little more detail, it is important to point out that Thomas takes this division of the speculative sciences as exhaustive. For Thomas, there could be no fourth speculative science; the reason for this is that the subject-matter of such a science would have to be those things that depend on matter and motion for their being understood but not for their being, for all other combinations have been exhausted. Now, if a thing depends on matter and motion for its being understood but not for its being, then matter and motion would be put into its definition, which defines a thing as it exists. But if a thing’s existence is so defined as to include matter and motion, then it follows that it depends on matter and motion for its being; for it cannot be understood to be without matter and motion. Hence, all things that include matter and motion in their definitions are dependent on matter and motion for their being, but not all things that depend on matter and motion for their being depend on matter and motion for their being understood. There could be no fourth speculative science since there is no fourth class of speculative objects depending on matter and motion for their being understood but not for their being. Thomas thus sees this threefold division of the speculative sciences as an exhaustive one.

The third class of speculative objects comprises the objects of metaphysics or theology. Now Thomas does not equate these two disciplines, but goes on to distinguish between the proper subject-matter of metaphysics and the proper subject-matter of theology. Recall that this third class of speculative objects comprises those things depending on matter and motion neither for their being nor for their being understood. Such things are thus immaterial things; however, Thomas here draws a distinction. There are things that are immaterial insofar as they are in themselves complete immaterial substances; God and the angels would be examples of such things. To give the latter a title, let them be called positively immaterial. On the other hand there are things that are immaterial insofar as they simply do not depend on matter and motion, but can nevertheless be sometimes said to be found therein. In other words, things of the latter category are neutral with respect to being found in matter and motion, and hence they are neutrally immaterial. St Thomas’s examples of the latter are: being, substance, potency, form, act, one and many; such things can apply equally to material things (such as humans, dogs, cats, mice) and, to some extent, to positively immaterial things. Thus, the neutrally immaterial seem to signify certain aspects or modes of being that can apply equally to material and to immaterial things. The question then arises: what is the proper subject-matter of metaphysics: the positively immaterial or the neutrally immaterial?

According to Thomas, unaided human reason cannot have direct knowledge of the positively immaterial; this is because such things (God and angels) outstrip the human intellect’s capacity to know. Nevertheless, direct knowledge of the positively immaterial is possible, but this will not be on the basis of unaided human reason; it will require that the positively immaterial reveal themselves to us in some way, in which case direct knowledge of the positively immaterial will be dependent on some sort of revelation. As it is a purely rational science, not dependent on or presupposing the truths of revelation, metaphysics will be a study of the neutrally immaterial aspects of things, that is, a study of those modes of being that apply to all beings, whether they are material or immaterial. Such a study will be in accord with the Aristotelian conception of metaphysics as a study of being qua being, insofar as the neutrally immaterial apply to all beings and are not restricted to a certain class of beings. However, Thomas does not adopt the Aristotelian phrase (being qua being) as the subject-matter of metaphysics, he offers his own term. According to Thomas, ens commune (common being) is the proper subject-matter of metaphysics. Through an investigation of ens commune, an investigation into the aspects of being common to all beings, the metaphysician may indeed come to a knowledge of the causes of being and might thereby be led to the affirmation of divine being, but this is only at the end of the metaphysical inquiry, not at the beginning. Thus, metaphysics for Aquinas is a study of ens commune where this is understood as the common aspects of being without which a thing could not be; it does not presuppose the existence of divine being, and may not even be led to an affirmation of divine being (though Thomas of course offers several highly complex metaphysical arguments for the existence of divine being, but this should not be taken to be essential to the starting point of Thomistic metaphysics).

Metaphysics then is a study of the certain aspects common to all beings; and it is the task of the metaphysician to uncover the aspects of being that are indeed common and without which a thing could not be. There are certain aspects of being that are common insofar as they are generally applicable to all beings, and these are essence and existence; all beings exist and have an essence, hence metaphysics will be primarily concerned with the nature of essence and existence and their relationship to each other. Having completed an investigation into essence and existence, the metaphysician must investigate the aspects of being that are common to particular instances of being; and this will be a study of (i) the composition of substance and accident, and (ii) the composition of matter and form. The format of Thomistic metaphysics then takes a somewhat dyadic structure of descending generality: (i) essence and existence, (ii) substance and accident, (iii) matter and form. The format of the remainder of this article will be an investigation into these dyadic structures.

2. Essence and Existence


A general notion of essence is the following: essence is the definable nature of the thing that exists. Quite generally then, the essence of a thing is signified by its definition. The immediate question then is how the essence of a thing relates to its existence. In finite entities, essence is that which has existence, but it is not existence; this is a crude articulation of Thomas’s most fundamental metaphysical teaching: that essence and existence are distinct in finite entities. A consideration then of essence and existence in Thomas’s metaphysical thought will thus be a consideration of his fundamental teaching that essence and existence are distinct.

The most famous, and to a certain degree the most controversial, instance wherein Thomas argues for a distinction between a thing’s essence and its existence is in De Ente et Essentia [On Being and Essence] Chapter Four. The context is a discussion of immaterial substances and whether or not they are composed of matter. In that passage, Thomas is concerned with a popular medieval discussion known as universal hylemorphism. St Bonaventure, Thomas’s contemporary, had held that insofar as creatures are in potency in some respect, they must be material in some respect, since on the Aristotelian account, matter is the principle of potency in a thing. Thus, creatures, even immaterial creatures, must be material in some respect, even if this materiality is nothing like our corporeal materiality. Thomas takes up this issue in De Ente Chapter 4, pointing out that the Jewish thinker Avicebron seems to have been the author of this position.

Thomas takes the notion of universal hylemorphism to be absurd. Not only does it conflict with the common sayings of the philosophers, but also it is precisely as separated from matter and all material conditions that we deem separate (immaterial) substances separate, in which case they cannot be composed of matter. But if such substances cannot be composed of matter, what accounts for their potentiality? Such substances are not God, they are not pure act, they are in potentiality in some respect. So, if they are not material, then how are they in potency? Thomas is thus led to hold that they have an element of potentiality, but this is not the potency supplied by matter; rather, immaterial substances are composed of essence and existence, and it is the essence of the thing, standing in potency to a distinct act of existence, that accounts for the potentiality of creatures and thereby distinguishes them from God, who is not so composed. Thomas’s argumentation for the distinction between essence and existence unfolds on three stages and for each stage there has been at least one commentator who has held that Thomas both intended and established the real distinction therein.

In the first stage Thomas argues as follows. Whatever does not enter into the understanding of any essence is composed with that essence from without; for we cannot understand an essence without understanding the parts of that essence. But we can understand the essence of something without knowing anything about its existence; for instance, one can understand the essence of a man or a phoenix without thereby understanding the existence of either. Hence, essence and existence are distinct.

This little paragraph has generated considerable controversy, insofar as it is unclear what sort of distinction Thomas intends to establish at this stage. Is it merely a logical distinction whereby it is one thing to understand the essence of a thing and another to understand its existence? On this account, essence and existence could well be identical in the thing yet distinct in our understanding thereof (just as ‘Morning star’ and ‘Evening star’ are distinct in our conceptual expressions of the planet Venus, yet both are identical with Venus). On the other hand, does Thomas attempt to establish a real distinction whereby essence and existence are not only distinct in our understanding, but also in the thing itself? Commentators who hold that this stage only establishes a logical distinction focus on the fact that Thomas is here concerned only with our understanding of essence and not with actual (real) things; such commentators include Joseph Owens and John Wippel. Commentators who hold that this stage establishes a real distinction focus on the distinction between the act of understanding a thing’s essence and the act of knowing its existence, and they argue that a distinction in cognitional acts points to a distinction in reality; such commentators include Walter Patt, Anthony Kenny, and Steven Long.

In the second stage of argumentation, Thomas claims that if there were a being whose essence is its existence, there could only be one such being, in all else essence and existence would differ. This is clear when we consider how things can be multiplied. A thing can be multiplied in one of three ways: (i) as a genus is multiplied into its species through the addition of some difference, for instance the genus ‘animal’ is multiplied into the species ‘human’ through the addition of ‘rational’; (ii) as a species is multiplied into its individuals through being composed with matter, for instance the species ‘human’ is multiplied into various humans through being received in diverse clumps of matter; (iii) as a thing is absolute and shared in by many particular things, for instance if there were some absolute fire from which all other fires were derived. Thomas claims that a being whose essence is its existence could not be multiplied in either of the first two ways (he does not consider the third way, presumably because in that case the thing that is received or participated in is not itself multiplied; the individuals are multiplied and they simply share in some single absolute reality). A being whose essence is its existence could not be multiplied (i) through the addition of some difference, for then its essence would not be its existence but its existence plus some difference, nor could it be multiplied (ii) through being received in matter, for then it would not be subsistent, but it must be subsistent if it exists in virtue of what it is. Overall then, if there were a being whose essence is its existence, it would be unique, there could only be one such being, in all else essence and existence are distinct.

Notice that Thomas has once again concluded that essence and existence are distinct. John Wippel takes this to be the decisive stage in establishing that essence and existence are really distinct. He argues that insofar as it is impossible for there to be more than one being whose essence is its existence, there could not be in reality many such beings, in which case if we grant that there are multiple beings in reality, such beings are composed of essence and existence. On the other hand, Joseph Owens has charged Wippel with an ontological move and claims that Wippel is arguing from some positive conceptual content, to the actuality of that content in reality. Owens argues that we cannot establish the real distinction until we have established that there is something whose essence is its existence. Given the existence of a being whose essence is its existence, we can contrast its existence with the existence of finite things, and conclude that the latter are composites of essence and existence; and so Owens sees the real distinction as established at stage three of Thomas’s argumentation: the proof that there actually is a being whose essence is its existence.

Thomas begins stage three with the premise that whatever belongs to a thing belongs to it either through its intrinsic principles,  its essence, or from some extrinsic principle. A thing cannot be the cause of its own existence, for then it would have to precede itself in existence, which is absurd. Everything then whose essence is distinct from its existence must be caused to be by another. Now, what is caused to be by another is led back to what exists in itself (per se). There must be a cause then for the existence of things, and this because it is pure existence (esse tantum); otherwise an infinite regress of causes would ensue.

It is here that Owens believes that Thomas establishes the real distinction; since Thomas establishes (to his own satisfaction) that there exists a being whose essence is its existence. Consequently, we can contrast the existence of such a being with the existence of finite entities and observe that in the latter existence is received as from an efficient cause whereas in the former it is not. Thus, essence and existence are really distinct. However, it is important to note that on this interpretation, the real distinction could not enter into the argument for the existence of a being whose essence is its existence; for, on Owens’s account, such argumentation is taken to establish the real distinction. If it can be shown then that Thomas’s argumentation for the existence of a being whose essence is its existence does presuppose the real distinction, then Owens’s views as to the stage at which the real distinction is established would be considerably undermined.

Having established (at some stage) that essence and existence are distinct and that there exists a being whose essence is its existence, Thomas goes on to conclude that in immaterial substances, essence is related to existence as potency to act. The latter follows insofar as what receives existence stands in potency to the existence that it receives. But all things receive existence from the being whose essence is its existence, in which case the existence that any one finite thing possesses is an act of existence that actuates a corresponding potency: the essence. Thomas has thus shown that immaterial substances do indeed have an element of potency, but this need not be a material potency.

Notice that here Thomas correlates essence and existence as potency and act only after he has concluded to the existence of a being whose essence is its existence (God). One wonders then whether or not essence and existence can be related as potency and act only on the presupposition of the existence of God. Regardless of his preferred method in the De Ente Chapter 4, Thomas could very well have focussed on the efficiently caused character of existence in finite entities (as he does in the opening lines of the argument for the existence of God), and argued that insofar as existence is efficiently caused (whether or not this is from God), existence stands to that in which it inheres as act to potency, in which case the essence that possesses existence stands in potency to that act of existence. Therefore, Thomas need not presuppose the existence of God in order to hold that essence and existence are related as potency and act; all he need presuppose is (i) that essence and existence are distinct and (ii) that existence is efficiently caused in the essence/existence composite.

3. Participation


Essence/existence composites merely have existence; whatever an essence/existence composite is, it is not its existence. Insofar as essence/existence composites merely have, but are not, existence, they participate in existence in order to exist. This is a second of Thomas’s fundamental metaphysical teachings: whatever does not essentially exist, merely participates in existence. Insofar as no essence/existence composite essentially exists, all essence/existence composites merely participate in existence. More specifically, the act of existence that each and every essence/existence composite possesses is participated in by the essence that exists.

As a definition of participation, Thomas claims that to participate is to take a part (in) (partem capere) something. Following this definition, Thomas goes on to explain how one thing can be said to take a part in and thereby participate in another; this can happen in three ways.

Firstly, when something receives in a particular fashion what pertains universally to another, it is said to participate in that other; for example, a species (‘man’) is said to participate in its genus (‘animal’) and an individual (Socrates) is said to participate in its species (‘man’) because they (the species and the individual) do not possess the intelligible structure of that in which they participate according to its full universality.

Secondly, a subject is said to participate in the accidents that it has (for instance, a man is a certain colour, and thereby participates in the colour of which he is), and matter is said to participate in the formal structure that it has (for instance, the matter of a statue participates in the shape of that statue in order to be the statue in question).

Thirdly, an effect can be said to participate in its cause, especially when the effect is not equal to the power of that cause. The effect particularises and determines the scope of the cause; for the effect acts as the determinate recipient of the power of the cause. The effect receives from its cause only that which is necessary for the production of the effect. It is in this way that a cause is participated in by its effect.

In all of the foregoing modes of participation, to participate is to limit that which is participated in some respect. This follows from the original etymological definition of participation, that to participate is to take a part (in); for if to participate is merely to take a part in something, the participant will not possess the nature of the thing in which it participates in any total fashion, but only in partial fashion. What then can we conclude about the participation framework that governs essence and existence?

Essences exist, but they do not exist essentially, they participate in their acts of existence. Insofar as an essence participates in its act of existence, the essence limits that act of existence to the nature of the essence whose act it is; for the essence merely has existence, it is not existence, in which case its possession of existence will be in accord with the nature of the essence. The act of existence is thus limited and thereby individuated to the essence whose act it is. As a concrete application of this, consider the following. George Bush’s existence is not Tony Blair’s existence; when George Bush came into existence, Tony Blair did not come into existence, and when George Bush ceases to exist, Tony Blair will, in all likelihood, not cease to exist. George Bush’s existence is not indexed to the existence of Tony Blair, in which case the existence of either George Bush or Tony Blair is not identical to the other. The act of existence then is individuated to the essence whose act it is, and this because the essence merely participates in, and thereby limits, the act of existence that it possesses.

4. Substance and Accident


The next fundamental metaphysical category is that of substance. According to Aquinas, substances are what are primarily said to exist, and so substances are what have existence but yet are not identical with existence. Aquinas’s ontology then is comprised primarily of substances, and all change is either a change of one substance into another substance, or a modification of an already existing substance. Given that essence is that which is said to possess existence, but is not identical to existence, substances are essence/existence composites; their existence is not guaranteed by what they are. They simply have existence as limited by their essence.

Let us begin with a logical definition of substance, as this will give us an indication of its metaphysical nature. Logically speaking, a substance is what is predicated neither of nor in anything else. This captures the fundamental notion that substances are basic, and everything else is predicated either of or in them. Now, if we transpose this logical definition of substance to the realm of metaphysics, where existence is taken into consideration, we can say that a substance is that whose nature it is to exist not in some subject or as a part of anything else, but what exists in itself. Thus, a substance is a properly basic entity, existing per se (though of course depending on an external cause for its existence), and the paradigm instances of which are the medium sized objects that we see around us: horses, cats, trees and humans.

On the other hand there are accidents. Accidents are what accrue to substances and modify substances in some way. Logically speaking, accidents are predicated of or in some substance; metaphysically speaking, accidents cannot exist in themselves but only as part of some substance. As their name suggests, accidents are incidental to the thing, and they can come and go without the thing losing its identity; whereas a thing cannot cease to be the substance that it is without losing its identity.

Accidents only exist as part of some substance. It follows then that we cannot have un-exemplified properties as if they were substances in themselves. Properties are always exemplified by some substance, whereas substance itself is un-exemplifiable. For example, brown is always predicated of something, we say that x is brown, in which case brown is an accident. However, brown is never found to be in itself, it is always exemplified by something of which it is said.

Within Aquinas’s metaphysical framework, substances can be both material (cats, dogs, humans) and immaterial (angels), but as noted above, the paradigm instances of substances are material substances, and the latter are composites of matter and form; a material substance is neither its matter alone nor its form alone, since matter and form are always said to be of some individual and never in themselves. It follows then that material substances have parts, and the immediate question arises as to whether or not the parts of substances are themselves substances. In order to address this issue, we must ask two questions: (i) while they are parts of a substance, are such parts themselves substances? and (ii) are the parts of a substance themselves things that can exist without the substance of which they are parts?

Concerning (i) we must say that whilst they are parts of a substance such parts cannot be substances; this is so given the definition of substance outlined above: that whose nature it is to exist not in some subject. Given that the parts of a substance are in fact parts of a substance, it is their nature to exist in some subject  of which they are a part. Consequently, the parts of a substance cannot themselves be substances.

Concerning (ii) the case is somewhat different, now we must consider whether or not the parts of a substance can exist without the substance of which they are parts, that is, after the dissolution of the substance of which they are parts do the parts become substances in themselves? The parts of a substance receive their identity through being the parts of the substance whose parts they are. Thus, the flesh and bone of a human are flesh and bone precisely because they are parts of a human. When the human dies, the flesh and bone are no longer flesh and bone (except equivocally speaking) because they are no longer parts of a human substance; rather, the flesh and bone cease to function as flesh and bone and begin to decompose, in which case they are not themselves substances. However, on Aquinas’s view, the elements out of which a substance is made can indeed subsist beyond the dissolution of the substance. Thus, whilst the elements are parts of the substance, they are not, as parts of a substance, substances in themselves, but when the substance dissolves, the elements will remain as independent substances in their own right. Thus, in the case of the dissolution of the human being, whilst the flesh and bone no longer remain but decompose, the elements that played a role in the formation of the substance remain. In more contemporary terms we could say that before they go to make up the bodily substances we see in the world, atoms are substances in themselves, but when united in a certain form they go to make cats, dogs, humans, and cease to be independent substances in themselves. When the cat or dog or human perishes, its flesh and bones perish with it, but its atoms regain their substantial nature and they remain as substances in themselves. So, a substance can have its parts, and for as long as those parts are parts of a substance, those parts are not substances in themselves, but when the substance decomposes, those parts can be considered as substances in themselves so long as they are capable of subsisting in themselves.

5. Matter and Form


A very crude definition of matter would be that it is the ‘stuff’ out of which a thing is made, whereas form is signified by the organisation that the matter takes. A common example used by Aquinas and his contemporaries for explaining matter and form was that of a statue. Consider a marble statue. The marble is the matter of the statue whereas the shape signifies the form of the statue. The marble is the ‘stuff’ out of which the statue is made whereas the shape signifies the form that the artist decided to give to the statue. On a more metaphysical level, form is the principle whereby the matter has the particular structure that it has, and matter is simply that which stands to be structured in a certain way. It follows from this initial account that matter is a principle of potency in a thing; since if the matter is that which stands to be structured in a certain way, matter can be potentially an indefinite number of forms. Form on the other hand is not potentially one thing or another; form as form is the kind of thing that it is and no other.

On Aquinas’s account, there are certain levels of matter/form composition. On one level we can think of the matter of a statue as being the marble whereas we can think of the shape of the statue as signifying the form. But on a different level with can think of the marble as signifying the form and something more fundamental being the matter. For instance, before the marble was formed into the statue by the sculptor, it was a block of marble, already with a certain form that made it ‘marble’. At this level, the marble cannot be the matter of the thing, since its being marble and not, say, granite, is its form. Thus, there is a more fundamental level of materiality that admits of being formed in such a way that the end product is marble or granite, and at a higher level, this formed matter stands as matter for the artist when constructing the statue.

If we think of matter as without any form, we come to the notion of prime matter, and this is a type of matter that is totally unformed, pure materiality itself. Prime matter is the ultimate subject of form, and in itself indefinable; we can only understand prime matter through thinking of matter as wholly devoid of form. As wholly devoid of form prime matter is neither a substance nor any of the other categories of being; prime matter, as pure potency, cannot in fact express any concrete mode of being, since as pure potency is does not exist except as potency. Thus, prime matter is not a thing actually existing, since it has no principle of act rendering it actually existing.

Matter can be considered in two senses: (i) as designated and (ii) as undesignated. Designated matter is the type of matter to which one can point and of which one can make use. It is the matter that we see around us. Undesignated matter is a type of matter that we simply consider through the use of our reason; it is the abstracted notion of matter. For instance, the actual flesh and bones that make up an individual man are instances of designated matter, whereas the notions of ‘flesh’ and ‘bones’ are abstracted notions of certain types of matter and these are taken to enter into the definition of ‘man’ as such. Designated matter is what individuates some form. As noted, the form of a thing is the principle of its material organisation. A thing’s form then can apply to many different things insofar as those things are all organised in the same way. The form then can be said to be universal, since it remains the same but is predicated over different things. As signifying the actual matter that is organised in the thing, designated matter individuates the form to ‘this’ or ‘that’ particular thing, thereby ensuring individuals (Socrates, Plato, Aristotle) of the same form (man).

Given that form is the principle of organisation of a thing’s matter, or the thing’s intelligible nature, form can be of two kinds. On the one hand, form can be substantial, organising the matter into the kind of thing that the substance is. On the other hand, form can be accidental, organising some part of an already constituted substance. We can come to a greater understanding of substantial and accidental form if we consider their relation to matter. Substantial form always informs prime matter and in doing so it brings a new substance into existence; accidental form simply informs an already existing substance (an already existing composite of substantial form and prime matter), and in doing so it simply modifies some substance. Given that substantial form always informs prime matter, there can be only one substantial form of a thing; for if substantial form informs prime matter, any other form that may accrue to a thing is posterior to it and simply informs an already constituted substance, which is the role of accidental form. Thus, there can only be one substantial form of a thing.

As stated above, essence is signified by the definition of a thing; essence is the definable nature of the thing that exists. A thing’s essence then is its definition. It follows that on Thomas’s account the essence of a thing is the composition of its matter and form, where matter here is taken as undesignated matter. Contrary to contemporary theories of essence, Aquinas does not, strictly speaking, take essence to be what is essential to the thing in question, where the latter is determined by a thing’s possessing some property or set of properties in all possible worlds. In the latter context, the essence of a thing comprises its essential properties, properties that are true of it in all possible worlds; but this is surely not Aquinas’s view. For Aquinas, the essence of a thing is not the conglomeration of those properties that it would possess in all possible worlds, but the composition of matter and form. On a possible-worlds view of essence, the essence of a thing could not signify the matter/form composite as it is in this actual world, since such a composite could be different in some possible world and therefore not uniform across all possible worlds. Thus, Aquinas does not adopt a possible-worlds view of essence; he envisages the essence of a thing as the definition or quiddity of the thing existing in this world, not as it would exist in all possible worlds.

6. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • St Thomas Aquinas, Summa Theologiae, trans. Fathers of the English Dominican Province (1948), U.S.A: Christian Classics.
    • Aquinas’s philosophical and theological masterpiece; Part I (Prima Pars) is the most important for Thomas’s metaphysical thought.
  • St Thomas Aquinas, The Divisions and Methods of the Sciences: Questions V and VI of his Commentary on the De Trinitate of Boethius, trans. Armand Maurer (1953) Toronto: Pontifical Institute of Medieval Studies.
    • A detailed consideration by Thomas of the divisions and methods of the sciences.
  • St Thomas Aquinas, On Being and Essence, trans. Armand Maurer (1968), Toronto: Pontifical Institute Medieval Studies.
    • An excellent summary from Aquinas himself of his metaphysical views.
  • St Thomas Aquinas, Summa Contra Gentiles, trans. A.C Pegis (1975), Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press.
    • One of Aquinas’s great Summae; books I and II are most important for Thomas’s metaphysical thought.
  • St Thomas Aquinas, Commentary on Aristotle’s Metaphysics, trans. John P. Rowan (1995), U.S.A: Dumb Ox Books.
    • A direct commentary on the Metaphysics of Aristotle.
  • St Thomas Aquinas, Aquinas on matter and form and the elements: a translation and interpretation of the De principiis naturae and the De mixtione elementorum of St. Thomas Aquinas, trans. Joseph Bobik (1998), Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press.
    • A translation of and commentary on Aqiunas’s works on ‘matter and form and the elements’.

b. General Studies

  • Clarke, W.N., Explorations in Metaphysics — Being, God, Person (1994), Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press.
  • Clarke, W.N., The One and the Many — A Contemporary Thomistic Metaphysics (2001), Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press.
  • Copleston, F., Aquinas (1955), London: Penguin.
  • Davies, B., The Thought of Thomas Aquinas (1993), Oxford: Clarendon Paperbacks.
  • Fabro, C., La Nozione Metafisica di Partecipazione secondo S. Tommaso d’Aquino (1950), Turin: Società Editrice Internazionale.
  • Fabro, C., Participation et causalité selon S. Thomas d’Aquin (1961), Louvain: Publications Universaitaires.
    • Both works by Fabro were groundbreaking for their uncovering the Platonic influences in Aquinas’s thought.
  • de Finance, J., Être et agir dans la philosophie de Saint Thomas (1960), Rome: Librairie Éditrice de l’Université Grégorienne.
  • Geiger, L-B., La participation dans la philosophie de s. Thomas d’Aquin (1953), Paris: Librairie Philosophique J. Vrin.
    • As with Fabro’s work, Geiger’s too uncovers the Platonic influences in Aquinas’s thought.
  • Kenny, A., Aquinas on Being (2003), Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Klima, G., ‘Contemporary “Essentialism” vs. Aristotelian Essentialism’, in John Haldane, ed., Mind Metaphysics, and Value in the Thomistic and Analytical Traditions (2002), Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press.
  • Kretzman, N., & Stump, E. eds. The Cambridge Companion to Aquinas (1993), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Long, S., ‘On the Natural Knowledge of the Real Distinction’, Nova et Vetera (2003), 1:1.
  • Long, S., ‘Aquinas on Being and Logicism’, New Blackfriars (2005), 86.
  • Owens, J., ‘A Note on the Approach to Thomistic Metaphysics’, The New Scholasticism (1954), 28:4.
  • Owens, J., ‘Quiddity and the Real Distinction in St Thomas Aquinas’, Mediaeval Studies (1965), 27.
  • Owens, J., The Doctrine of Being in the Aristotelian Metaphysics (1978), Toronto: Pontifical Institute of Medieval Studies.
  • Owens, J., St Thomas Aquinas on the Existence of God — The Collected Papers of Joseph Owens ed. Catan, John. R. (1980), Albany: State University of New York Press.
  • Owens, J., ‘Stages and Distinction in De Ente’, The Thomist, (1981), 45.
  • Owens, J., An Elementary Christian Metaphysics (1985), Houston, Texas: Bruce Publishing Company.
  • Owens, J., An Interpretation of Existence (1985), Texas: Center for Thomistic Studies — University of St Thomas.
  • Owens, J., ‘Aquinas’s Distinction at De Ente et Essentia 4.119 — 123’, Mediaeval Studies (1986), 48.
  • Patt, W. ‘Aquinas’s Real Distinction and some Interpretations’, The New Scholasticism (1988), 62:1.
  • Stump, E., Aquinas (2003), London-New York: Routledge.
    • Part I, Chapter I, offers a very good survey of Aquinas’s metaphysics, but leaves out details of his theory of essence/existence composition. Pp. 36 – 44 are particularly illuminating on matter and form, substance and accident.
  • Torrell, J.-P., Saint Thomas Aquinas: The Person and His Work, trans. Robert Royal (1996), Washington: The Catholic University of America Press.
    • This is the most up-to-date publication on Aquinas’s life and work.
  • te Velde R. A., Participation and Substantiality in Thomas Aquinas (1995), Leiden-New York-Cologne: E.J. Brill.
  • Wippel, J., 1979: ‘Aquinas’s Route to the Real Distinction’, The Thomist, 43.
  • Wippel, J.,  Metaphysical Themes in Thomas Aquinas (1984), USA: The Catholic University of America Press.
  • Wippel, J.,  The Metaphysical Thought of Thomas Aquinas (2000), USA: The Catholic University of America Press.
  • Wippel, J.,  Metaphysical Themes in Thomas Aquinas II (2007), USA: The Catholic University of America Press.
    • Wippel’s work is generally taken to be essential for scholarly work on Aquinas’s metaphysical thought.


Author Information

Gaven Kerr
Queen's University Belfast
Northern Ireland

Medieval Theories of Aesthetics

The term ‘aesthetics’ did not become prominent until the eighteenth century in Germany; however, this fact does not prevent principles of aesthetics from being present in the Middles Ages. Developments in the Middles Ages paved the way for the future development of aesthetics as a separate discipline. Building on notions from antiquity (most notably Plato and Aristotle) through Plotinus, the medieval thinkers extended previous concepts in new ways, making original contributions to the development of art and theories of beauty.

Certain topics, such as proportion, light, and symbolism, played important roles in medieval aesthetics, and they will be given prominence in this article. Proportion was particularly important for architecture, which is apparent in the cathedrals. Medieval thinkers were also interested in the concept of light: what it is and how it affects everything, especially color. Symbolism was based on the view that the creation revealed God; therefore, symbolic meaning could be communicated through artwork, in particular to those who are illiterate.

Three philosophers, St. Augustine, Pseudo-Dionysius and St. Thomas Aquinas, provided significant contributions to aesthetic theory during the Middle Ages. These three philosophers employed the two predominant approaches to philosophy in the Middle Ages. Augustine and Pseudo-Dionysius were mainly influenced by Plato and Neoplatonism, while Thomas was mostly influenced by Aristotle. Due to their impact on the history of philosophy (in particular, aesthetics), these philosophers will be given more detailed treatment.

Table of Contents

  1. Influences on the Medieval Philosophers
    1. Plato
    2. Aristotle
    3. Plotinus
  2. Topics in Aesthetics
    1. Proportion
    2. Light and Color
    3. Symbolism
  3. Individuals on Aesthetics
    1. St. Augustine
    2. Pseudo-Dionysius
    3. St. Thomas Aquinas
  4. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Influences on the Medieval Philosophers

a. Plato

Plato’s philosophy enjoyed a noticeable presence during the medieval period, especially in the writings of Augustine and Pseudo-Dionysius. The doctrine of the Forms was particularly salient.  According to Plato, there is a perfect Form of Beauty in which beautiful things participate.  For thinkers such as Augustine and Pseudo-Dionysius, platonic forms (including the form of Beauty) are in fact ideas in the mind of God, and the world is but a shadow of the divine image.  On this view, all beautiful things participate not in some abstract universal, but in God’s beauty.  Given Plato’s obvious influence on subsequent theories of aesthetics, further consideration of his views would be helpful.

Plato’s most prominent contribution to aesthetics is his notion of mimesis (imitation). Mimesis derives from the idea that beautiful things are mere replicas of Beauty itself. So conceived, beautiful things participate in the Forms by means of imitation. Moreover, Plato thought that the artist could only imitate sensible objects (or actions) which are themselves imitations of some form. On his view, such imitation results from a lack of knowledge of the Forms, the true essences of which artistic representations are but deficient approximations. Therefore, such representation is “far removed from the truth” (Plato, Republic, 598b5).  Plato famously illustrates this point through the example of a bed (Plato, Republic, 597b ff.). There is a perfect Form of a bed, which exists as the nature of a bed. Then, a carpenter makes a bed. Lastly, a painter paints a picture of the bed that the carpenter constructed. The painter’s imitation is three times removed from the true nature (or Form) of the bed.

A further aspect of imitation that concerned Plato was its socially corrosive influence. The concern is raised most notably in connection to poetry and staged tragedies. For example, if the youth see evil men prosper in plays, then the youth will be more inclined to become evil. “For that reason, we must put a stop to such stories, lest they produce in the youth a strong inclination to do bad things” (Republic 391e). Plato’s concern with how art affects people is also a concern for the medieval philosophers. Mimetic arts were forbidden from Plato’s ideal city, even those that would attempt to imitate the virtues. Plato allowed only those works of art that would perform some didactic function. The Catholic Church, during the medieval period, also used art to perform a didactic function, especially to communicate the faith to the illiterate.

b. Aristotle

Although Plato’s influence, in most areas of philosophy, was initially stronger, Aristotle’s system of logic dominated medieval philosophy. Eventually, through the writings of Albert the Great and Thomas Aquinas, the  balance of Aristotle’s philosophy achieved greater respect than it had in the eyes of Christian philosophers and theologians. Of particular interest is Aristotle’s metaphysics. The concept of form, especially in terms of formal causality, provided a ground for later theories of beauty, which connected the beauty of an object to its form. In other words, an object’s form is the cause of its beauty. The main difference between Aristotle’s notion of form and Plato’s notion of the Forms is that Aristotle thought the form of the object was constituted by the essential or species-defining properties inhering in the object.  Plato maintained that the Forms of each thing existed in a realm that transcended physical things.

Another concept relevant for medieval aesthetics is found in the Metaphysics (see III.3), where Aristotle presented the foundation for the medieval notion of transcendentals. He specifically highlighted the interchangeable relationship between being and one. Though Aristotle never called them transcendentals, he prompted this conception by claiming that the notions “being” and “one” are the same. “[Being and unity] are implied in one another as principle and cause are.” (Metaphysics, 1003b23). Transcendentals transcend traditional Aristotelian categories. They are interchangeable with each other, and they are inseparable in terms of their ontological status. Transcendentals (more in subsection 3.c St. Thomas Aquinas) were particularly important to such thinkers as Thomas Aquinas, Avicenna, and Averroes.

Aristotle’s Poetics also contains several ideas that were important for medieval aesthetics. First, consider Aristotle’s notion of imitation. He writes, “A tragedy, then, is the imitation of an action that is serious and also, having magnitude, complete in itself; in language with pleasurable accessories, each kind brought in separately in the parts of the work; in a dramatic, not in narrative form; with incidents arousing pity and fear, wherewith to accomplish its catharsis of such emotions” (Aristotle, Poetics, 1449b25). Aristotle’s notion of mimesis is similar to the view of Plato, since they both claim that art imitates nature. However, Aristotle does not think that nature imitates the realm of the Forms. While Plato thinks that imitations are deficient replicas of real essences, Aristotle believes that imitation is natural and can also be used to educate (Poetics 1448b7).

Second, consider the notion of catharsis, developed in connection to Aristotle’s definition of tragedy. Aristotle uses this word twice in the Poetics (1449b7; 1455b15); it seems that he believed a tragedy could cleanse negative emotions such as fear and pity.

Finally, Aristotle emphasized some characteristics that art requires in order to be good. “Beauty is a matter of size and order” (Aristotle, Poetics, 1450b37). Size is important because something too small or too large is beyond one’s capacity to perceive the whole, which specifically related to the length of plays. Order concerns the relationship of the parts with each other and with the whole, which was also very important to medieval philosophers and artisans.

c. Plotinus

The Neoplatonic philosopher Plotinus provided two main contributions to guide medieval thinking on aesthetics. First, Plotinus made it clear that beauty chiefly applies to the sense of sight and hearing (Plotinus I.6.1), which was maintained in the Middle Ages. This notion is not only a contribution to a theory of beauty, but it delineates two senses as having primacy over the others for the acquisition of knowledge. And beauty, for the medieval philosophers, was frequently connected with knowledge.

Second, Plotinus argued against the notion that proportion is the primary component of beauty. “Almost everyone declares that symmetry of parts towards each other and towards a whole, with, besides, a certain charm of color, constitutes the beauty recognized by the eye, that in visible things, as indeed in all else, universally, the beautiful thing is essentially symmetrical, patterned” (Plotinus I.6.1). Plotinus proceeds to argue that simple things could not be beautiful, if symmetry was the only component of beauty. In other words, only compound things could be beautiful in a proper sense, if beauty depended on symmetry. Moreover, only the whole object would be beautiful, not its parts. The problem, for Plotinus, is that if something is beautiful, it must be composed of beautiful parts. If the parts are not symmetrical in themselves, then they could not be beautiful. This fact leads to an absurd conclusion, according to Plotinus; namely, a beautiful object could be composed of ugly parts. Plotinus does not suggest that symmetry is irrelevant or unnecessary for beauty; his point is that symmetry cannot be the only standard by which to measure an object’s beauty.

2. Topics in Aesthetics

a. Proportion

Proportion was very important to the medieval artisans, especially for architecture and music. In architecture, the primacy of proportion is most clearly seen in the cathedrals. Some cathedrals, from an aerial viewpoint, were in the shape of a cross. This shape also created a balance when viewed from within the cathedral. Paintings  had to exhibit balance in their compositions and it was important for music to exhibit harmony, in order for it to be beautiful.

The Pythagoreans are credited as being the first to study the relationships between numbers and sounds. They discovered certain pitches and proportions to be more pleasing to people than others, and these discoveries were propagated in the middle ages. Boethius writes in De Musica, “Nothing is more proper to human nature than to abandon oneself to sweet modes and to be vexed by modes that are not” (quoted in Eco, 2004, 62). Harmony has its origin in God; and therefore, music designed to bring one closer to God must be harmonious. The psychological effect of various musical modes was an important part of the theories of music. For example, some rhythms were considered to lead people more easily into lustful sins, while other rhythms were deemed appropriate for the education of young people. The earliest example of the effects of music was the story of Pythagoras allegedly calming a drunk adolescent simply by making the youth listen to a certain melody (in Hypophrygian mode). Music could influence the soul of human beings; therefore, the type of music people could hear had to be the sort that would positively influence them.

“The proportions that govern the dimensions of Greek temples, the intervals between the columns or the relationships between the various parts of the façade, correspond to the same ratios that govern musical intervals” (Eco, 2004, 64). The same principles of harmony and proportion applied to all the arts, although there were differences in the way they were applied. The numerical ratios, however, were the same because mathematical values are immutable. For example, the Golden Section, considered to be the most aesthetically pleasing proportion, was often the basis of proportions in architecture and painting.  Even though they were concerned with form, it should be stressed that the medievals were not advocates of form over function. The purpose of the building or painting was the most important thing for an artisan to consider. The form was manipulated in such a way to fulfill the purpose of the work.

b. Light and Color

Medieval scientists, such as Robert Grosseteste, were interested in discovering the nature of light. Grosseteste’s treatise, On Light, blends Neoplatonist theories of emanation and aspects of Aristotle’s cosmology. The effects of light became more important to the medieval artisans, particularly in architecture, and they frequently associated light with their theories of color. Light and color affected the thoughts of medieval thinkers on certain characteristics of beauty, such as radiance and clarity.

One of the motivations for the medieval philosophers to pursue the notion of light developed from the belief that God is Light. Though Plotinus was not a Christian, the seeds of this idea that God is Light can be seen in his writings. “The simple beauty of a color is derived from a form that dominates the obscurity of matter and from the presence of an incorporeal light that is reason and idea” (Plotinus, I.6). The incorporeal light, for the Christians, is God’s light and gives splendor to the whole of creation. Light is what allows the beauty of objects, especially their color, to become illuminated, in order to display their beauty to the fullest. Pseudo-Dionysius follows up on these thoughts, “And what of the sun’s rays? Light comes from the Good, and light is an image of this archetypal Good. Thus the Good is also praised by the name ‘Light’, just as an archetype is revealed in its image” (Pseudo-Dionysius, 74). The light of the sun is a mere reflection and symbol of the divine light. The sun illuminates the universe, but the sun’s light is not used up. Light, for the medieval philosophers, is an important condition for there to be beauty.

Light illuminates the colors, which led the medieval thinkers to construct theories about color. Hugh of Saint Victor wrote, “With regard to the color of things there is no lengthy discussion, since sight itself demonstrates how much Beauty it adds to nature, when this last is adorned by many different colors” (quoted in Eco, 2004, 125). There is a sense in which color causes beauty, since everything has color. Hence, more radiant colors will cause the object to be more radiant and, therefore, more beautiful.

c. Symbolism

Symbolism was employed, first, as a tool to give meaning to artworks, and, second, it was used in a hermeneutical sense, to discover the deeper meaning of texts (especially the Bible). Medieval symbolism derives from a particular view of the world. Umberto Eco explains, “Firstly there was metaphysical symbolism, related to the philosophical habit of discerning the hand of God in the beauty of the world. Secondly there was universal allegory; that is, perceiving the world as a divine work of art, of such a kind that everything in it possesses moral, allegorical, and analogical meanings in addition to its literal meaning” (Eco, 1986, 56). The main idea is that the universe revealed God, its author or creator, through its beauty. As Pseudo-Dionysius wrote, “Any thinking person realizes that the appearances of beauty are signs of an invisible loveliness” (The Celestial Hierarchy, I.3). This belief was influenced by the Platonic notion that things on earth are shadows of things from the realm of Forms. Therefore, medieval artists wanted to construct their art in a symbolic manner, which would, likewise, help point to God.

Symbolism has connotations in the realm of hermeneutics, which is based on this notion that beauty in nature reflects God’s beauty. To put it differently, God revealed Himself to human beings through general revelation (nature) and special revelation (the Bible). For Aquinas, all knowledge about God begins in the material realm through the senses (ST I.88.3). People who did not have access to the Bible, because of cultural differences or illiteracy, could still receive God’s truth through nature, if they sought it. Therefore, medieval artists tried to create art for those who did not have literary access to the Bible by using symbols.

3. Individuals on Aesthetics

a. St. Augustine

Augustine set the stage for medieval Christian philosophers, drawing heavily from the Platonist and Neo-Platonist traditions. As a result, Platonic philosophy dominated the Christian medieval thought until Thomas Aquinas helped to popularize the writings of Aristotle. Augustine made a sharp distinction between the creation of God (ex nihilo) and the creation of artists (ex materia). Hence, God’s creation was not related to the notion of mimesis, which was perceived to be the goal of the arts. Even natural beauty, which was made by God, is like a shadow of God’s beauty, rather than fully actualized beauty. In a sense, God’s beauty emanates out to natural things through His act of creation. The framework for this idea had its source in Neoplatonic philosophers, particularly Plotinus. God created matter, which was initially formless, “without any beauty” (Augustine, Confessions, Bk. 12.3). The earth occupies the lowest form of beauty, and things become more beautiful as they possess more form, and less of the void. God is supremely beautiful, since only God possesses perfect form. Augustine, therefore, believes in a hierarchy of beautiful things, based on how much form they possess or lack.

Augustine developed ideas about rhythm that are pertinent to his aesthetic theory, especially the belief that rhythm originates with God. This idea of rhythm is expounded in Augustine’s De Musica. For Augustine, rhythm is immutable and eternal because its source is God. Augustine demonstrates this by pointing out that people can decide to begin pronounce a word in a differently, since pronunciation arises through convention. However, mathematical truths cannot be determined by convention; they have already been determined. They can only be discovered by human beings. Augustine then claims that rhythm is like math; it can only be discovered by people. Rhythm is already determined in God, and human beings cannot invent it. The way Augustine describes this process of discovery is reminiscent of, though not identical with, Plato’s theory of recollection. In other words, rhythm can be discovered through a questioner (or investigation), like Socrates’ questioning of the servant boy in the Meno.

Unity, equality, number, proportion, and order are the main elements in Augustine’s theory of beauty (Beardsley, 93ff.). Beardsley points out that Augustine does not systematically present these characteristics of beauty, but they can be found, often in relation to one another, throughout his writings. First, everything exists as a separate whole unit; therefore, each thing has unity. Simply put, something cannot have the potential to be beautiful, unless it exists. And if it has existence, it will also be a unified whole. Thus, unity is a necessary element of beauty. Further, the more unified something is the more beautiful it will be. Second, concerning equality (or likeness), Beardsley writes, “The existence of individual things as units, the possibility of repeating them and comparing groups of them with respect to equality or inequality, gives rise to proportion, measure, and number” (Beardsley, 94). Third, “Number, the base of rhythm, begins from unity” (De Musica, xvii. 56). Number, for Augustine, measures rhythm. Since rhythm is based on number, which Augustine believes is immutable, then it follows that rhythm is likewise immutable. Fourth, “in all the arts it is symmetry [or proportion] that gives pleasure, preserving unity and making the whole beautiful” (Of True Religion, xxx. 55). Fifth, Augustine asserts, “everything is beautiful that is in due order” (Of True Religion, xli. 77). Moreover, Augustine says, “Order is the distribution which allots things equal and unequal, each to its own place” (City of God, XIX, xiii). In other words, the degree to which things are in their proper place is the degree in which they are beautiful.

b. Pseudo-Dionysius

About the sixth century, the writings of the anonymous author Pseudo-Dionysius, emerged and influenced philosophers, most notably Thomas Aquinas. His main work that has relevance for aesthetics is The Divine Names, in which he refers to God as Beautiful. For Pseudo-Dionysius, “beautiful” refers to something that participates in beauty, while “beauty” refers to that ingredient that makes things beautiful. In the Cause (God), “beautiful” and “beauty” have no distinction because the Cause gathers everything back into Itself. The beautiful, which is God, is unchangeably beautiful; therefore, the beautiful cannot cease to be beautiful. This immutable beauty would have to truly exist, if the beautiful is the source of all beauty. Pseudo-Dionysius explains, “For beauty is the cause of harmony, of sympathy, of community. Beauty unites all things and is the source of all things” (Pseudo-Dionysius, 77). Further, he claims, “This – the One, the Good, the Beautiful – is in its uniqueness the Cause of the multitudes of the good and the beautiful” (Pseudo-Dionysius, 77).  Two main points can be taken from these statements. First, beauty is the cause of any beautiful thing that exists; and, second, the beautiful and the good are the same. Since beauty is the source of all things that exist, everything has a degree of beauty. Accordingly, everything has a desire and drive to move back toward the Beautiful and Good, that is, the source of the beauty of everything. This cyclical process is evident throughout Pseudo-Dionysius’ thought and illustrates Plotinus’ influence. It also prefigures Thomas’ belief that God is the source of all beauty, and the final end of human beings is the beatific vision, where people see God in His glory.

c. St. Thomas Aquinas

In terms of aesthetics, Thomas Aquinas focused his comments mostly on the notion of beauty. However, he did not say enough to have a detailed system; his views are extracted from what he did say. The discussion here will deal with his definition of beauty, the standards of beauty, and the question of whether beauty is a transcendental.

Thomas’ definition of beauty is as follows: beauty is that which gives pleasure when seen (ST I-II, 27. 1). This definition, at first glance, seems to suggest a subjective understanding of beauty for Thomas. The ambiguity comes from this word ‘seen,’ which has a different implication than it might seem in English. One might be tempted to equate seen with glance or notice; however, these possibilities are incomplete because they imply a passive account of seeing. The notion of ‘seen’ is more closely associated with the activity of contemplation. Jacques Maritain offers some helpful explanation,

Beauty is essentially the object of intelligence, for what knows in the full meaning of the word is the mind, which alone is open to the infinity of being. The natural site of beauty is the intelligible world: thence it descends. But it falls in a way within the grasp of the senses, since the senses in the case of man serve the mind and can themselves rejoice in knowing: ‘the beautiful relates only to sight and hearing of all senses, because these two are maxime cognoscitivi’(Maritain, 23).

Knowing beauty is not the result of a discursive process, nevertheless it is an activity of the mind. Knowledge in general, for Thomas, occurs when the form of an object, without its matter, exists in the mind of the knower (De Trinitate, q. 5, a. 2). For example, suppose someone is gazing at a flower. The same form, which is immaterial, of the flower in extra-mental reality is received by the senses and begins to exist in the mind of the knower. Then, the knower can contemplate the form of the object and discover its beauty. This process could transpire quickly. The knower (or beholder) receives data from the sensible world through the senses, but the senses do not recognize something as beautiful. The mind is responsible for recognizing the beauty of a given object. Consequently, knowledge has two aspects: passive and active. The passive aspect receives data from extra-mental reality; the active aspect gives the abstracted forms new existence in the mind of the knower. The details of this process are not relevant here; it is mainly important to see that the form of the object in reality begins to exist in the mind of the knower. Since beauty, for Thomas, is caused by the form of the object, then this process explains how the apprehension of beauty is the result of cognition.

More specifically, the senses of sight and hearing are those through which the beholder receives the form of the object. For Thomas, these senses are the most important ones for cognition; therefore, they are the ones employed in perceiving the beautiful. Thomas maintains the objectivity of beauty, in the sense that beauty resides in the object. In other words, beauty is not a concept in the mind of the beholder imposed onto a given object. If beauty is objective, then there must be some criteria by which we discover whether something is in fact beautiful.

The criteria of beauty are not precise formulae for discovering or labeling beautiful things with absolute certainty. These criteria are more like guideposts to help finite minds apprehend beauty. They do not have to all be present for an object to be considered beautiful, and the presence of one does not guarantee that the object is beautiful. For Thomas, beauty has four primary standards: actuality, proportion, radiance, and integrity (ST, I.39.8c). The original context of this list is centered on the relationship of the three persons of the trinity, specifically in reference to the Son. The Son has integrity insofar as he “has in Himself truly and perfectly the nature of the Father.” The Son has proportion “inasmuch as He is the express Image of the Father.” Lastly, the third property [radiance, brightness, or clarity] is found in the Son, as the Word, “which is the light and splendor of the intellect.” Since Thomas did not specifically expound on these properties in relationship to art, modern commentators and interpreters have tried to fill in this gap. Therefore, the exposition of the properties below comes largely from Armand Maurer, Umberto Eco, and Etienne Gilson.

Actuality. Actuality is not mentioned in Thomas’ list of the characteristics of beauty. However, for Thomas, everything has its ultimate source in actuality (or being); therefore, actuality (or being) is the basis of beauty. According to Maurer, actuality is used in three ways when referring to beauty: existence, form, and action (Maurer, 6ff.). Beauty is grounded in the actual existence of the object. For Thomas, everything that has being will also have a degree of beauty, regardless of how small that degree appears. In other words, an object must exist, in some sense, in order for it to be beautiful; otherwise, it would be nothing. Therefore, actuality is the ground of beauty. Maurer explains, “Whatever actuality a being has over and above its existence, it owes to its existence. For without existence there is no being; there is simply nothing. So the actuality of existence is the source and origin of the whole being, including its beauty” (Maurer, 7).

The second aspect of actuality is form. Form separates the existence of different things. For example, a dog and a tree both exist, but the dog exists as a dog and the tree exists as a tree. “As each thing has its own form, so it has its own distinctive beauty. In the words of St. Thomas, ‘Everything is beautiful in proportion to its own form’” (Maurer, 8). This interpretation of Thomas can be gleaned from his account of the relationship between goodness and form (ST I.5.5). To summarize this passage, everything is what it is because of its form; therefore, a thing has more goodness [and beauty] when it achieves a higher level of perfection in its form. A tree is beautiful to the degree in which it perfectly attains to the form of a tree and, likewise, a dog would be beautiful according to the form of a dog.

The third aspect of actuality is action. “Action completes the actuality of existence and form” (Maurer, 8). A clear illustration of the notion of action is a dancer. A dancer sitting and drinking coffee is still a dancer, in the sense that she possesses the skill required for dancing. Yet she is most completely a dancer when she performs the act of dancing. Strictly speaking, actuality is not a characteristic of beautiful things; more precisely, it is the necessary condition for grounding beauty in anything.

Proportion. Plotinus had already dismissed the notion of proportion (or symmetry or harmony) as the only qualification of beauty; however, the medieval philosophers still believed proportion had some importance for beauty. “We have only to think of the symmetry of the petals of an orchid, the balance of a mathematical equation, the mutual adaptation of the parts of a work of art, to realize how important the factor of harmony is in beauty” (Maurer, 10-11). The object may actually be symmetrical, but it is more important that it is well-balanced. The parts of the whole are in harmony with one another. Proportion is mentioned in this quote from Thomas’ Summa:

Proportion is twofold. In one sense it means a certain relation of one quantity to another, according as double, treble and equal are species of proportion. In another sense every relation of one thing to another is called proportion. And in this sense there can be a proportion of the creature to God, inasmuch as it is related to Him as the effect of its cause, and as potentiality to its act; and in this way the created intellect can be proportioned to know God (ST I.12.1).

Following Eco, proportion, according to this statement, could be reduced to relationships of quantity and relationships of quality (Eco, 1988, 82). Relationships of quantity are more mathematical, while those of quality are considered more ‘habitual’, which Eco explains as a relation of “mutual reference  or analogy, or some kind of agreement between them which subjects both to a common criterion or rule” (Eco, 1988, 82). This second relationship could be one of matter to form, cause to effect, and Creator to created (SCG II.16.8; II.80-81.7).

Radiance. “Radiance belongs to being considered precisely as beautiful: it is, in being, that which catches the eye, or the ear, or the mind, and makes us want to perceive it again” (Gilson, 2000, 35). Radiance is a bit more difficult to pinpoint than the other standards. Radiance signifies the luminosity that emanates from a beautiful object, which initially seizes the attention of the beholder. This trait is closely related to the medieval notions concerning light. For example, in terms of natural light, there is a sense in which the paintings in a gallery lose some of their beauty when the lights are turned off because they are no longer being perceived. However, Thomas also connects beautiful things with the divine light. “All form, through which things have being, is a certain participation in the divine clarity [or light]. And this is what [Dionysius] adds, that particulars are beautiful because of their own nature – that is, because of their form” (Thomas, Commentary on the Divine Names, IV.6). This quote provides another account of Thomas connecting all beauty to the beauty of God, as the cause of all beauty.

Wholeness. The last standard of beauty for Thomas is wholeness or integrity. “The first meaning of this term, for St. Thomas, is existential: it expresses the primal perfection of a thing, which is found in its existence (esse). In a second sense a thing is integral when it is perfect in its operation. Wholeness, in short, demands perfection in being and action” (Maurer, 29). If some particular thing was perfectly beautiful, then it would have to be completely actualized, lacking nothing essential to its nature. In other words, anything that is imperfect in some way is lacking some thing or ability necessary for its completion. Thomas speaks about wholeness [or integrity] in the context perfection: “The 'first' perfection is that according to which a thing is substantially perfect, and this perfection is the form of the whole; which form results from the whole having its parts complete” (ST I.73.1).

Whether or not beauty is a transcendental property of being will be the last topic in this entry. As a starting point, something is considered a transcendental if it “can be predicated of being as such and therefore of every being” (Koren, 48). The notion of transcendentals has its origins in Aristotle, specifically the Metaphysics. Aristotle claimed, as quoted earlier, that being and unity are implied in one another (Metaphysics, 1003b23). From this beginning, the medieval philosophers developed a broader notion of transcendentals; the three most mentioned transcendentals are one, true, and good. Aquinas' main presentation of the transcendentals is found in his Questiones Disputatae de Veritate, Question 1. In this text, Aquinas claims that being is the first thing conceived by the intellect because “every reality is essentially a being” (Disputed Questions on Truth, Q.1). Yet, Aquinas writes, “some predicates may be said to add to being inasmuch as they express a mode of being not expressed by the term being” (Disputed Questions on Truth, Q.1).

A predicate can add to being in two ways. First, the predicate may express a special mode of being. For example, in itself expresses a special mode of being, namely a substance, but it fails to be a transcendental because it does not apply to being as such. It applies only to individual beings. Second, a predicate may express a mode of being that is common to every being in general. This second mode can be understood in two ways: (1) absolutely – referring to a being as it relates to itself; (2) relatively – referring to a being as it relates to other beings.

A predicate can express being in reference to itself (or being-absolutely) either affirmatively or negatively. Affirmatively, Aquinas claims that the predicate thing is a transcendental, since each being is a unified whole. Negatively, Aquinas claims that the predicate one is a transcendental, since each being is undivided with reference to itself.

Moving to the predicates that express a relative mode of being, Aquinas claims that there are two ways. The first way refers to the idea that each being is separate from all other beings, so Aquinas refers to something (or otherness) as a transcendental property of being. The second way is based on the correspondence that one being has with another, which also has two facets. As a precondition, Aquinas writes, “This is possible only if there is something which is such that it agrees with every being. Such a being is the soul, which, as is said in The Soul, 'in some way is all things.' The soul, however, has both knowing and appetitive powers” (Disputed Questions on Truth, Q.1). In terms of the knowing power, true is a transcendental property because all knowing is an assimilation of the thing known by the knower. In terms of the appetitive power, good is a transcendental because the good is “that which all desire” (referring to Aristotle's Ethics).

To summarize, transcendentals are properties of being as such (that is, every being). Each transcendental is convertible with being. In other words, the transcendentals are present wherever being is present. However, just like being can be found in varying degrees, the transcendentals can also be found in degrees. For example, every being is not perfectly or completely good, but every being is good to a degree. So, Aquinas' list of transcendentals consists of the following: thing, one, something, true, and good. But is this list necessarily exhaustive? Could other things, such as beauty, be transcendentals?

Some interpreters of Aquinas' thought have claimed that beauty is not a transcendental; so, Aquinas left it off his list intentionally. Jan Aertsen, toward arguing that beauty is not a transcendental, attempts to clarify what it means for something to be a transcendental. He writes, “If the beautiful is a transcendental, then it must participate in the two features of transcendentals: because of their universal extension they are really identical, but they differ from one another conceptually” (Aertsen, 71). Aertsen concedes the first feature in reference to beauty; beauty is identical to the other transcendentals, particularly the good. However, he rejects the idea that beauty is conceptually different from the good, which, if correct, would prevent beauty from being counted among the transcendentals. Considering beauty as a kind of sub-category of the good is probably the main reason for rejecting it as a transcendental.

Contrary to Aertsen, Jacques Maritain (and others, like Etienne Gilson and Umberto Eco) maintains that beauty is a transcendental. The main problem with this view is that Aquinas did not include beauty in his list. Concerning this problem, an accepted explanation does not exist. Like Aertsen, Maritain claims that beauty is identical with the other transcendentals. But, contrary to Aertsen, Maritain asserts that Aquinas makes it clear that beauty and goodness are conceptually distinct. Specifically, Maritain refers to a passage in the Summa Theologia where Aquinas writes,

They [beauty and goodness] differ logically, for goodness properly relates to the appetite (goodness being what all things desire); and therefore it has the aspect of an end (the appetite being a kind of movement towards a thing). On the other hand, beauty relates to the cognitive faculty; for beautiful things are those which please when seen. Hence beauty consists in due proportion; for the senses delight in things duly proportioned, as in what is after their own kind-because even sense is a sort of reason, just as is every cognitive faculty. Now since knowledge is by assimilation, and similarity relates to form, beauty properly belongs to the nature of a formal cause (ST I.5.4).

Aquinas asserts in this passage that beauty and goodness differ logically. Maritain and others use this passage to show that Aquinas claimed that beauty and goodness were conceptually different, yet metaphysically identical. If Maritain, and others, are correct, then beauty could count as a transcendental property of being.

As this last section on transcendentals illustrates, while medieval philosophers did not develop a system of aesthetics they do provide an interesting entry point to the study of aesthetics . Ideas concerning the beautiful are spread throughout their writings,  gathered and developed by later philosophers.

4. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Aristotle. The Complete Works of Aristotle. 2 Vols. Edited by Jonathan Barnes. Princeton University Press, 1984.
  • Augustine. Of True Religion. Translated by J. H. S. Burleigh. Chicago:Henry Regnery Company, 1968.
  • Baird, Forrest E. and Walter Kaufmann. Medieval and Renaissance Philosophy. 5th ed. Upper Saddle River: Pearson Prentice Hall, 2008.
  • Hofstadter, Albert and Richard Kuhns, ed. Philosophies of Art and Beauty: Selected Readings in Aesthetics from Plato to Heidegger. The University of Chicago Press, 1964 (This book was primarily used for its selections from Augustine).
  • Plato. Complete Works. Edited by John M. Cooper. Indianapolis, Hackett Publishing Company, 1997.
  • Plotinus. The Enneads. Translated by Stephen MacKenna. Burdett: Larson Publications, 1992.
  • Pseudo-Dionysius. The Complete Works. Translated by Colm Luibheid. New York: Paulist Press, 1987.
  • Thomas Aquinas. Summa Theologiae (ST). Translated by Fathers of the English Dominican Province. Westminster: Christian Classics, 1981.
  • Thomas Aquinas. Summa Contra Gentiles (SCG). 5 Volumes. University of Notre Dame Press, 1975.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Aertsen, Jan A. “Beauty in the Middle Ages: A Forgotten Transcendental?” Medieval Philosophy and Theology. Vol. 1. (1991), 68-97.
  • Beardsley, Monroe. Aesthetics from Classical Greece to the Present: A Short History. Tuscaloosa: University of Alabama Press, 1966.
  • Coomaraswamy, Ananda K. Christian and Oriental Philosophy of Art. New York: Dover Publications, Inc., 1956.
  • Eco, Umberto. Art and Beauty in the Middle Ages. Translated by Hugh Bredin. New Haven: Yale University Press, 1986.
  • Eco, Umberto. The Aesthetics of Thomas Aquinas. Translated by Hugh Bredin. Harvard University Press, 1988.
  • Eco, Umberto. Ed. History of Beauty. Translated by Alastair McEwen. New York: Rizzoli, 2004.
  • Gilson, Etienne. The Arts of the Beautiful. Dalkey Archive Press, 2000.
  • Gilson, Etienne. Painting and Reality. New York: Pantheon Books, 1957.
  • Koren, Henry. An Introduction to the Science of Metaphysics. St. Louis: B. Herder Book Company, 1955.
  • Maritain, Jacques. Art and Scholasticism. Translated by J. F. Scanlan. New York: Charles Scribner’s Sons, 1930.
  • Maurer, Armand. About Beauty: A Thomistic Interpretation. Houston: Center for Thomistic Studies, 1983.

Author Information

Michael Spicher
University of South Carolina
U. S. A.

Aquinas: Philosophical Theology

aquinasIn addition to his moral philosophy, Thomas Aquinas (1225-1274) is well-known for his theological writings.   He is arguably the most eminent philosophical theologian ever to have lived.  To this day, it is difficult to find someone whose work rivals Aquinas' in breadth and influence.  Although his work is not limited to illuminating Christian doctrine, virtually all of what he wrote is shaped by his theology.  Therefore it seems appropriate to consider some of the theological themes and ideas that figure prominently in his thought.

The volume and depth of Aquinas' work resists easy synopsis.  Nevertheless, an abridged description of his work may help us appreciate his  philosophical skill in exploring God’s nature and defending Christian teaching.  Although Aquinas does not think that philosophical reasoning can provide an exhaustive account of the divine nature, it is (he insists) both a source of divine truth and an aid in exonerating the intellectual credibility of those doctrines at the heart of the Christian faith.  From this perspective, philosophical reasoning can be (to use a common phrase) a tool in the service of theology.

An adequate understanding of Aquinas' philosophical theology requires that we first consider the twofold manner whereby we come to know God:  reason and sacred teaching.  Our discussion of what reason reveals about God will naturally include an account of philosophy’s putative success in demonstrating both God’s existence and certain facts about God’s nature.  Yet because Aquinas also thinks that sacred teaching contains the most comprehensive account of God’s nature, we must also consider his account of faith—the virtue whereby we believe well with respect to what sacred teaching reveals about God.  Finally, we will consider how Aquinas employs philosophical reasoning when explaining and defending two central Christian doctrines:  the Incarnation and the Trinity.

Table of Contents

  1. Preliminary Matters: How Can We Know Divine Truth?
  2. Natural Theology
    1. Can We Demonstrate God’s Existence?
    2. A Sample Demonstration: The Argument from Efficient Causality
    3. God’s Nature
  3. Faith
    1. What is Faith?
    2. Faith and Voluntariness
    3. Faith and Reason
  4. Christian Doctrine
    1. Incarnation and Atonement
    2. Trinity
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources
    3. Internet Resources

1. Preliminary Matters: How Can We Know Divine Truth?

How can we know realities of a divine nature?  Aquinas  posits a “twofold mode of truth concerning what we profess about God” (SCG 1.3.2).  First, we may come to know things about God through rational demonstration.  By demonstration Aquinas means a form of reasoning that yields conclusions that are necessary and certain for those who know the truth of the demonstration’s premises.  Reasoning of this sort will enable us to know, for example, that God exists.  It can also demonstrate many of God’s essential attributes, such as his oneness, immateriality, eternality, and so forth (SCG 1.3.3).  Aquinas is not claiming that our demonstrative efforts will give us complete knowledge of God’s nature.  He does think, however, that human reasoning can illuminate some of what the Christian faith professes (SCG 1.2.4; 1.7).  Those aspects of the divine life which reason can demonstrate comprise what is called natural theology, a subject we will address in section 2.

Obviously, some truths about God surpass what reason can demonstrate.  Our knowledge of them will therefore require a different source of divine truth, namely, sacred teaching.  According to Aquinas, sacred teaching contains the most complete and reliable account of what we profess about God (SCG I.5.3).  Of course, whether sacred teaching is authoritative vis-à-vis divine realties depends on whether what it says about God is true.  How, then, can we be confident that sacred teaching is, in fact, a reliable source of divine knowledge?  An extended treatment of this matter requires that we consider the role faith plays in endorsing what sacred teaching proposes for belief.  This issue is addressed in section 3.

2. Natural Theology

Generally speaking, natural theology (NT) is a discipline that seeks to demonstrate God’s existence or aspects of his nature by means of human reason and experience.  The conclusions of NT do not rely on supernaturally revealed truths;  its point of departure is that which can be ascertained by means of the senses or rational methods of investigation.  So understood, NT is primarily a philosophical enterprise.  As one commentator explains, NT “amounts to forgoing appeals to any putative revelation and religious experience as evidence for the truth of propositions, and accepting as data only those few naturally evident considerations that traditionally constitute data acceptable for philosophy generally.  That’s what makes it natural theology” (Kretzmann, 1997: 2).

A caveat:  It is a mistake to construe NT as an autonomous branch of inquiry, at least in Aquinas' case.  In fact, partitioning NT from divine revelation does a disservice to the theological nature of Aquinas' overall project (for an extended defense of this position, see Hibbs, 1995 and 1998; Stump, 2003: 26-32).  For Aquinas is not content with simply demonstrating the fact of God’s existence.  The first article of ST makes this clear.  There, he asks whether knowledge of God requires something more than what philosophical investigation is able to tell us (ST Ia 1.1).  His answer is yes: although natural human reason can tell us quite a bit about God, it cannot give us salvific knowledge.  He writes:  “it was necessary for the salvation of man that certain truths which exceed human reason should be made known to him by divine revelation” (Ibid.).  In discussing truths that human reason can demonstrate, then, we should keep in mind that they comprise an overture to a more enriched and explicitly theological account of God’s nature.

a. Can We Demonstrate God’s Existence?

Aquinas thinks there are a variety of ways to demonstrate God’s existence.  But before he turns to them, he addresses several objections to making God an object of demonstration.  This essay will consider two of those objections.  According to the first objection, God’s existence is self-evident.  Therefore, any effort to demonstrate God’s existence is, at best, unnecessary (ST Ia 2.1 ad 1; SCG 1.10.1).  For Aquinas, this objection rests on a confusion about what it means for a statement to be self-evident.  He explains:  a statement is self-evident if its predicate is contained in the essence of the subject (ST Ia 2.1).  For example, the statement a triangle is a 3-sided planar figure is self-evident because the predicate-term (3-sided planar figure) is a part of the subject-term’s (triangle) nature.   Anyone who knows what a triangle is will see that this statement is axiomatic; it needs no demonstration.  On the other hand, this statement will not appear self-evident to those who do not know what a triangle is.  To employ Aquinas' parlance, the statement is self-evident in itself (per se notum secundum se) but not self-evident to us (per se notum quod nos) (ST IaIIae 94.2;  Cf. ST Ia 2.1).  For a statement is self-evident in itself so long as it accurately predicates of the subject-term the essential characteristics it has.  Whether a statement is self-evident to us, however, will depend on whether we understand the subject-term to have those characteristics.

The aforementioned distinction (per se notum secundum se/per se notum quod nos) is helpful when responding to the claim that God’s existence is self-evident.  For Aquinas, the statement God exists is self-evident in itself since existence is a part of God’s essence or nature (that is, God is his existence—a claim to which we’ll turn below).  Yet the statement is not self-evident to us because God’s essence is not something we can comprehend fully.  Indeed, it is unlikely that even those acquainted with the idea of God will, upon reflecting on the idea, understand that existence is something that God has necessarily.  Although Aquinas does not deny that knowledge of God is naturally implanted in us, such knowledge is, at best, inchoate and imprecise;  it does not convey absolutely that God exists  (ST Ia 2.1 ad 1).  We acquire definitive knowledge of God’s existence in the same way we come to understand other natural causes, namely by identifying certain facts about the world—observable effects whose obviousness makes them better known to usand then attempting to demonstrate their pre-existing cause (ST Ia 2.2).  In other words, knowledge of God’s existence must be acquired through a posteriori demonstrations.  We will consider one of these demonstrations below.  At this point, we simply are trying to show that since God’s existence is not (to us) self-evident, the use of theistic demonstrations will not be a pointless exercise.

The second objection to the demonstrability of God’s existence is straightforward:  that which is of faith cannot be demonstrated.  Since God’s existence is an article of faith, it is not something we can demonstrate (ST Ia 2.2 obj. 1).  Aquinas' response to this argument denies that God’s existence is an article of faith.  That is, he denies that God’s existence is a supernaturally revealed truth.  Instead, God’s existence is a demonstrable fact which supernaturally revealed truths presuppose.  The assent of faith involves embracing doctrinal teachings about God, whose existence is already assumed.  For this reason, Aquinas describes God’s existence not as an article of faith but as a preamble to the articles.  As such, God’s existence can be the subject of demonstration.

Aquinas concedes that, for some people, God’s existence will be a matter of faith.  After all, not everyone will be able to grasp the proofs for God’s existence.  Thus for some people it is perfectly appropriate to accept on the basis of sacred teaching that which others attempt to demonstrate by means of reason (ST Ia 2.2 ad 1).

b. A Sample Demonstration: The Argument from Efficient Causality

In the Summa Theologiae Ia 2.3, Aquinas offers five demonstrations for God’s existence (these are famously referred to as the “five ways”).  Each demonstration proceeds roughly as follows:  Aquinas identifies some observable phenomenon and then attempts to show that, necessarily, the cause of that phenomenon is none other than God. The phenomena Aquinas cites in these demonstrations include: 1) motion; 2) the existence of efficient causes; 3) the reality of contingency; 4) the different grades of perfection in the natural order; and 5) the end-directed activity of natural objects.   We should note that these demonstrations are highly abridged versions of arguments he addresses at length elsewhere (most notably, SCG I.13). Constraints of space do not permit an explication of each argument. But it will be helpful to consider at least one argument in order to see how these demonstrations typically proceed.

Aquinas' argument from efficient causes—also known as "the second way"—is straightforward and does not lend itself to many interpretative disputes.   The argument is as follows:

In the world of sense we find there is an order of efficient causes. There is no case known (neither is it, indeed, possible) in which a thing is found to be the efficient cause of itself; for then it would be prior to itself, which is impossible. Now in efficient causes it is not possible to go on to infinity, because in all efficient causes following in order, the first is the cause of the intermediate cause, and the intermediate [cause] is the cause of the ultimate cause, whether the intermediate cause be several, or only one. Now to take away the cause is to take away the effect. Therefore, if there be no first cause among efficient causes, there will be no ultimate, nor any intermediate cause. But if in efficient causes it is possible to go on to infinity, there will be no first efficient cause, neither will there be an ultimate effect, nor any intermediate efficient causes; all of which is plainly false. Therefore it is necessary to admit a first efficient cause, to which everyone gives the name of God (ST Ia 2.3).

For our purposes, it might be helpful to present Aquinas' argument in a more formal way:

  1. The world contains instances of efficient causation (given).
  2. Nothing can be the efficient cause of itself.
  3. So, every efficient cause seems to have a prior cause.
  4. But we cannot have an infinite regress of efficient causes.
  5. So there must be a first efficient cause “to which everyone gives the name God.”

First premise.  Like all of Aquinas' theistic demonstrations, this one begins by citing an observable fact about the world, namely, that there are causal forces that produce various effects.  Aquinas does not say what these effects are, but according to John Wippel, we can assume that these effects would include “substantial changes (generation and corruption of substances) as well as various instances of motion … that is, alteration, local motion, increase, and decrease” (2006: Wippel, 58). Note here that there is no need to prove this premise.  Its truth is manifestly obvious, and thus Aquinas employs it as an argumentative point of departure.

Second premise. Aquinas then claims that it is impossible for any being to be the efficient cause of itself.  Why is self-causation impossible?  For the sake of ease, consider what it would mean for something to be the cause of its own existence (although this is not the only form of self-causation Aquinas has in mind).  In order to bring about the existence of anything, one needs a certain amount of causal power.  Yet a thing cannot have causal power unless it exists.  But if something were to be the cause of itself—that is, if it were to bring about its own existence—it would have to exist prior to itself, which is impossible (ST Ia 2.3).  Hence the third premise: every efficient cause must have a prior cause.

Aquinas' argument in the first way—which is structurally similar to the argument from efficient causality—employs a parallel line of reasoning.  There, he says that to be in motion is to move from potentiality to actuality.  When something moves, it goes from having the ability to move to the activity of moving.  Yet something cannot be the source of its own movement.  Everything that moves does so in virtue of being moved by something that is already actual or “in act.”  In short, “whatever is in motion must be put in motion by another” (ST Ia 2.3).

Aquinas' aim here is not to explain discrete or isolated instances of causation.  His interest, rather, is the existence of a causal order—one consisting of substances whose existence and activity depend on prior causes of that same order (Wippel, 59).  Yet this attempt to clarify Aquinas' aim introduces an obvious problem.  If every constituent member of that order is causally dependent on something prior to itself, then it appears that the order in question must consist of an infinite chain of causes.  Yet Aquinas denies this implication (fourth premise): if the causal order is infinite, then (obviously) there could be no first cause.  But without a first cause, then (necessarily) there could be no subsequent effects—including the intermediate efficient causes and ultimate effect (ST Ia 2.3).  In other words, the absence of a first cause would imply an absence of the causal order we observe.  But since this implication is manifestly false, he says, there must be a first cause, “to which everyone gives the name God” (Ibid.).

A few clarifications about this argument are in order.  First, commentators stress that this argument does not purport to show that the world is constituted by a temporal succession of causes that necessarily had a beginning (see for example Copleston, 1955: 122-123).  Interestingly, Aquinas himself denies that the argument from efficient causality contradicts the eternality of the world (ST Ia 46.2 ad 1).  Whether the world began to exist can only be resolved, he thinks, by appealing to sacred teaching.  Thus he says that “by faith alone do we hold, and by no demonstration can it be proved, that the world did not always exist" (ST Ia 46.2).  With respect to the second way, then, Aquinas' aim is simply to demonstrate that the order of observable causes and effects cannot be a self-existing reality.

An illustration may help clarify the sort of argument Aquinas wishes to present.  The proper growth of, say, plant life depends on the presence of sunlight and water.  The presence of sunlight and water depends on ideal atmospheric activities.  And those atmospheric activities are themselves governed by more fundamental causes, and so forth.  In this example, the events described proceed not sequentially, but concurrently. Even so, they constitute an arrangement in which each event depends for its occurrence on causally prior events or phenomena.  According to Copleston, illustrations of this sort capture the kind of causal ordering that interests Aquinas.  For “when Aquinas talks about an ‘order’ of efficient causes he is not talking of a series stretching back into the past, but of a hierarchy of causes, in which a subordinate member is here and now dependent on the causal activity of a higher member” (Copleston, 1955: 122).  Thus we might explain the sort of ordering that interests Aquinas as a metaphysical (as opposed to a temporal) ordering of causes.  And it is this sort of order that requires a first member, that is, “a cause which does not depend on the causal activity of a higher cause” (Ibid., 123).  For, as we have already seen, the absence of a first cause would imply the absence of subsequent causes and effects.  Unless we invoke a cause that itself transcends the ordering of dependent causes, we would find it difficult to account for the causal activities we presently observe.  Aquinas therefore states there must be “a first efficient, and completely non-dependent cause,” whereby “the word ‘first’ does not mean first in the temporal order but supreme or first in the ontological order” (Ibid.: 123;  For valuable commentaries on these points, see Copleston, 122-124; Wippel, 2006: 59; Reichenbach, 2008).

Second, it may appear that Aquinas is unjustified in describing the first efficient cause as God, as least if by “God” one has in mind a person possessing the characteristics Christian theologians and philosophers attribute to him (for example, omniscience, omnipotence, omnipresence, love, goodness, and so forth.).  Yet Aquinas does not attempt to show through the previous argument that the demonstrated cause has any of the qualities traditionally predicated of the divine essence.  He says:  “When the existence of a cause is demonstrated from an effect, this effect takes the place of the definition of the cause in proof of the cause's existence” (ST Ia 2.2 ad 2).  In other words, the term God—at least as it appears in ST Ia 2.2—refers only to that which produces the observed effect.  In the case of the second way, God is synonymous with the first efficient cause;  it does not denote anything of theological substance.  We might think of the term “God” as a purely nominal concept Aquinas intends to investigate further (Te Velde, 2006: 44; Wippel, 2006:  46).  For the study of what God is must be subsequent to demonstrating that he is.  A complete account of the divine nature requires a more extensive examination, which he undertakes in the subsequent articles of ST.

c. God’s Nature

Once Aquinas completes his discussion of the theistic demonstrations, he proceeds to investigate God’s nature.  Such an investigation poses unique challenges.  Although Aquinas thinks that we can demonstrate God’s existence, our demonstrative efforts cannot tell us everything about what God is like.  As we noted before, God’s nature—that is, what God is in himself—surpasses what the human intellect is able to grasp (SCG I.14.2).  Aquinas therefore does not presume to say explicitly or directly what God is.  Instead, he investigates divine nature by determining what God is not.  He does this by denying of God those properties that are conceptually at odds with what is already concluded by means of the five ways (ST Ia 3 prologue;  Cf. SCG I.14.2 and 3).

Aquinas acknowledges a potential worry for his view.  If the method by which we investigate God is one of strict remotion, then no divine predicate can describe what God is really like.  As one objection states:  “it seems that no name can be applied to God substantially.  For Damascene says … ‘Everything said of God signifies not his substance, but rather exemplifies what he is not; or expresses some relation, or something following his nature or operation” (ST Ia 13.2 ad 1).  In other words, the terms we attribute to God either function negatively (for example, to say God is immaterial is to say he is “not material”) or describe qualities that God causes his creatures to have.  To illustrate this second alternative:  consider what we mean when we say “God is good” or “God is wise.”  According to the aforementioned objection, to say that God is good or wise is just to say that God is the cause of goodness and wisdom in creatures; the predicates in question here do not tell us anything about God’s nature (Ibid.).

For Aquinas, however, the terms we predicate of God can function positively, even if they cannot capture perfectly or make explicit the divine nature.  Here’s how.  As we have discussed, natural knowledge of God is mediated by our knowledge of the created order.  The observable facts of that order reveal an efficient cause that is itself uncaused—a self-subsisting first mover that is uncreated and is not subject to any change.  According to Aquinas, this means that God, from whom everything else is created, “contains within Himself the whole perfection of being” (ST Ia 4.2). But as the ultimate cause of our own existence, God is said to have all the perfections of his creatures (ST Ia 13.2).  Whatever perfections reside in us must be deficient likenesses of what exists perfectly in God.  Consequently, Aquinas thinks that terms such as good and wise can refer back to God.  Of course, those terms are predicated of God imperfectly just as God’s creatures are imperfect likenesses of him.  “So when we say, ‘God is good,’ the meaning is not, ‘God is the cause of goodness,’ or ‘God is not evil’; but the meaning is, ‘Whatever good we attribute to creatures, pre-exists in God,’ and in a more excellent and higher way” (Ibid.).

Moreover, denying certain properties of God can, in fact, give us a corresponding (albeit incomplete) understanding of what God is like.  In other words, the process of articulating what God is not does not yield an account of the divine that is wholly negative.  Here is a rough description of the way Aquinas' reasoning proceeds:  we reason from theistic arguments (particularly the first and second ways) that God is the first cause; that is, God is the first being in the order of efficient causality. If this is so, there can be no potency or unrealized potential in God.  For if something has the potential or latent capacity to act, then its activity must be precipitated by some prior actuality.  But in this line of reasoning, there is no actuality prior to God.  It must follow, then, that God is pure actuality, and this in virtue of being the first cause (ST Ia 3.1).  So although this process denies God those traits that are contrary to what we know about him, those denials invariably yield a fairly substantive account of the divine life

Other truths necessarily follow from the idea that God is pure actuality.  For example, we know that God cannot be a body.  For a characteristic feature of bodies is that they are subject to being moved by something other than themselves.  And because God is not a body, he cannot be a composite of material parts (ST Ia 3.7).  Not only does Aquinas think that God is not a material composite, he also insists that God is not a metaphysical composite (Vallencia, 2005).  In other words, God is not an amalgam of attributes, nor is he a being whose nature or essence can be distinguished from his existence.  He is, rather, a simple being.

The doctrine of divine simplicity is complicated and controversial—even among those who admire Aquinas' philosophical theology.  But the following account should provide the reader with a rough sketch of what this doctrine involves.  Consider the example human being. A person is a human being in virtue of her humanity, where “humanity” denotes a species-defining characteristic.  That is, humanity is an essence or “formal constituent” that makes its possessor a human being and not something else (ST Ia 3.3).  Of course, a human being is also material being.  In virtue of materiality, she possesses numerous individuating accidents. These would include various physical modifications such as her height or weight, her particular skin pigmentation, her set of bones, and so forth.  According to Aquinas, none of these accidental traits are included in her humanity (indeed, she could lose these traits, acquire others, and remain a human being).  They do, however, constitute the particular human being she is.  In other words, her individuating accidents do not make her human, but they do make her a particular exemplification of humanity.  This is why it would be incorrect to say that this person is identical to her humanity; instead, the individuating accidents she has make her one of many instances thereof.

But what about substances that are not composed of matter?  Such things cannot have multiple instantiations since there is no matter to individuate them into discrete instances of a specific nature or essence.  An immaterial substance then will not instantiate its nature. Instead, the substance will be identical to its nature.  This is why Aquinas insists that there can be no distinction between (1) God and (2) that by which he is God.  “He must be his own Godhead, His own life, and thus whatever else is predicated of him” (ST Ia 3.3).  For example, we often say that God is supremely good.  But it would be a mistake on Aquinas' view to think that goodness is a property that God has, as if goodness is a property independent of God himself.  For “in God, being good is not anything distinct from him;  he is his goodness” (SCG I.3.8).  Presumably we can say the same about his knowledge,  perfection, wisdom, and other essential attributes routinely predicated of him.

So far we’ve considered the way God, as non-physical being, is simple.  What he is (God) is indistinguishable from that by which he is (his divine essence).  Presumably other immaterial beings would be simple in precisely this way in virtue of their immateriality.  Consider, for example, the notion of angels.  That there is no matter with which to individuate angelic beings implies that there will not be multiple instantiations of an angelic nature.  Like Aquinas' notion of God, each angelic being will be identical to its specific essence or nature (ST Ia 3.3).  But God is obviously unlike angelic beings in an important way.  Not only is God the same as his essence;  he is also the same as his existence (ST Ia 3.4;  Cf. 50.2 ad 3).  In order to see what this means, consider the conclusions from section 2.2b.  There, we noted that the constituent members of the causal order cannot be the cause of their own existence and activity.  For “it is impossible for a thing's existence to be caused by its essential constituent principles, for nothing can be the sufficient cause of its own existence, if its existence is caused” (Ibid.).  Thus the constituent members of the causal order must exist in virtue of some other, exterior principle of causality.

We are now in a position to see why, according to Aquinas, God and the principle by which he exists must be the same.  Unlike the constituent members of the causal order, all of whom receive their existence from some exterior principle, God is an uncaused cause.  In other words, God’s existence is not something bequeathed by some exterior principle or agent.  If it was, then God and the principle by which he exists would be different.  Yet the idea that God is the first efficient cause who does not acquire existence from something else implies that God is his own existence (Ibid).  Brain Davies explains this implication of the causal argument in the following way:

The conclusion Aquinas draws [from the five ways] is that God is his own existence.  He is Ipsum Esse Subsitens.  “Existence Itself” or “underived … Existence.” To put it another way, God is not a creature.  Creatures, Aquinas thinks, “have” existence, for their natures (what they are) do not suffice to guarantee their existence (that they are).  But with God this is not so.  He does not “have” existence; his existence is not received or derived from another.  He is his own existence and is the reason other things have it (Davies, 1992: 55).

For additional discussion of Aquinas' argument for God's existence, see Scriptural Roots and Aquinas’s Fifth Way.

3. Faith

So far, this article has shown how and to what extent human reason can lead to knowledge about God and his nature.  Aquinas clearly thinks that our demonstrative efforts can tell us quite a bit about the divine life.  Yet he also insists that it was necessary for God to reveal to us other truths by means of sacred teaching.  Unlike the knowledge we acquire by our own natural aptitudes, Aquinas contends that revealed knowledge gives us a desire for goods and rewards that exceed this present life (SCG I.5.2).  Also, revealed knowledge may tell us more about God than what our demonstrative efforts actually show.  Although our investigative efforts may confirm that God exists, they are unable to prove (for example) that God is fully present in three divine persons, or that it is the Christian God in whom we find complete happiness (ST Ia 1.1;  SCG I.5.3).  Revealed knowledge also curbs the presumptuous tendency to think that our cognitive aptitudes are sufficient when trying to determine (more generally) what is true (SCG I.5.4).

Moreover, Aquinas contends that it was fitting for God to make known through divine revelation even those truths that are accessible to human reason.  For if such knowledge depended strictly on the difficult and time-intensive nature of human investigation, then few people would actually possess it.  Also, our cognitive limitations may result in a good deal of error when trying to contrive successful demonstrations of divine realities.  Given our proneness to mistakes, relying on natural aptitude alone may seem particularly hazardous, especially when our salvation is at stake (Ibid.; Cf. SCG I.4.3-5).  For this reason, Aquinas insists that having “unshakable certitude and pure truth” with respect to the divine life requires that we avail ourselves of truths revealed by God and held by faith (Ibid., I.4.6).

a. What is Faith?

But what is “faith”?  Popular accounts of religion sometimes construe faith as a blind, uncritical acceptance of myopic doctrine.  According to Richard Dawkins, “faith is a state of mind that leads people to believe something—it doesn’t matter what—in the total absence of supporting evidence. If there were good supporting evidence then faith would be superfluous, for the evidence would compel us to believe it anyway” (Dawkins, 1989: 330).  Such a view of faith might resonate with contemporary skeptics of religion.  But as we shall see, this view is not remotely like the one Aquinas—or historic Christianity for that matter—endorses.

To begin with, Aquinas takes faith to be an intellectual virtue or habit, the object of which is God (ST IIaIIae 1.1;  4.2).  There are other things that fall under the purview of faith, such as the doctrine of the Trinity and the Incarnation.  But we do not affirm these specific doctrines unless they have some relation to God.  According to Aquinas, these doctrines serve to explicate God’s nature and provide us with a richer understanding of the one in whom our perfect happiness consists (Ibid.).  And although faith is an intellectual virtue, it would be a mistake to construe the act of faith as something that is purely cognitive in nature, such as the belief that 2 + 2 = 4, or that Venus is a planet, or that red is a primary color.  These beliefs are not (so it seems) things over which we have much voluntary control.  Perhaps this is because their truth is manifestly obvious or because they are based on claims that are themselves self-evident.  In either case, it doesn’t appear that we choose to believe these things.

By contrast, the assent of faith is voluntary.  To employ Aquinas' terminology, the assent of faith involves not just the intellect but the will (ST IIaIIae 1.2).  By will Aquinas means a native desire or love for what we think contributes to our happiness.  How is the will involved in the assent of faith?  Aquinas appears to have something like this in mind:  suppose a person, upon hearing a homily or a convincing argument, becomes persuaded that ultimate human happiness consists in union with God.  For Aquinas, the mere acknowledgment of this truth does not denote faith—or at least a commendable form of faith that is distinct from believing certain propositions about God.  After all, the demons believe many truths about God, but they are compelled to believe due to the obviousness of those truths.  Their belief is not shaped by an affection for God and thus not praiseworthy (ST IIaIIae 5.2 ad 1 and 2).  Thus we can imagine that a person who is convinced of certain sacred truths may (for any number of reasons) choose not to consider or endorse what she now believes. Alternatively, she may, out of love for God, actively seek God as her proper end.   According to Aquinas, this love for God is what distinguishes faith from the mere acknowledgement that certain theological statements are true.  For faith involves an appetitive aspect whereby the will—a love or desire for goodness—moves us to God as the source of ultimate happiness (ST IIaIIae 2.9 ad 2; IIaIIae 4.2;  cf. Stump, 1991: 191).  We’ll say more about the relationship between love and faith in the following sub-section.

But what prompts the will to desire God?  After all, Christianity teaches that our wills have been corrupted by the Fall.  As a result of that corruption, Christian doctrine purports that we invariably love the wrong things and are inclined to ends contrary to God’s purposes.  The only way we would be motivated to seek God is if our wills were somehow changed;  that is, we must undergo some interior transformation whereby we come to love God.  According to Aquinas, that transformation comes by way of grace.  We will say more about grace in the following subsection of this article.  For now, we can construe grace as Aquinas does:  a good-making habit that inclines us to seek God and makes us worthy of eternal life (QDV 27.1).  According to Aquinas, if a person seeks God as the supreme source of human happiness, it can only be because God moves her will by conferring grace upon her.  That is why Aquinas insists that faith involves a “[voluntary] assent to the Divine truth at the command of the will moved by the grace of God” (ST IIaIIae 2.9;  Cf. 2.2).  Of course, just what it means for one’s will to be both voluntary and moved by God’s grace is a subject about which there is contentious debate.  How can the act of faith be voluntary if the act itself is a result of God generating a change in the human will?  This is the problem to which we’ll now turn.

b. Faith and Voluntariness

We may think that voluntary actions are the products of one’s free decisions and not compelled or generated by causal forces outside of one’s own will.  According to Aquinas, however, the act of faith is precipitated by grace, whereby God draws the will to himself (ST IaIIae 109.7). Does the infusion of grace contravene the sort of voluntariness that Aquinas insists is a component of faith?  Limitations of space prohibit an extensive treatment of this subject.  For this reason, a brief presentation of Aquinas' view will follow.

The act of faith has a twofold cause:  one is external, the other is internal.  First, Aquinas says that faith requires an “external inducement, such as seeing a miracle, or being persuaded by someone” by means of reason or argument (ST IIaIIae 6.1;  Cf. 2.9 ad 3).  Observing a supernatural act or hearing a persuasive sermon or argument may corroborate the truth of sacred teaching and, in turn, encourage belief.  These inducements, however, are not sufficient for producing faith since not everyone who witnesses or hears them finds them compelling.  As Aquinas observes, of “those who see the same miracle, or who hear the same sermon, some believe, and some do not” (Ibid.).  We must therefore posit an internal cause whereby God moves the will to embrace that which is proposed for belief.  But how is it that God moves the will?  In other words, what does God do to the will that makes the assent of faith possible?  And how does God’s effort to dispose our will in a certain way not contravene its putative freedom?  None of the proposed answers to this question are uncontroversial, but what follows appears to be faithful to the view Aquinas favored (for some competing interpretations of Aquinas' account, see Jenkins, 1998; Ross, 1985; Penelhum, 1977; and Stump, 1991 and 2003).

As indicated in the previous sub-section, charity, or the love of God, moves a person to faith (ST IIaIIae 4.3).  Aquinas states “charity is the form of faith” because the person who places her faith in God does so because of her love for God.  Thus we might think of the inward cause of faith to be a kind of infused affection or, better yet, moral inclination whereby the will is directed to God (Ibid.; 23.8).  As a result of this moral posturing, a person will be able to view Christian teaching more favorably than she would were it not for the infusion of charity.  John Jenkins endorses a similar account.  He suggests that pride, excessive passion, and other vicious habits generate within us certain prejudices that prevent us from responding positively to sacred teaching (Jenkins, 1998: 207-208).  A will that is properly directed to God, however, does not refuse a fair and charitable evaluation of Scripture’s claims.  Jenkins writes:  “a good will [and by this he means a will that has been moved by God’s grace]…permits us to see clearly and impartially that truths which are beyond our understanding…nevertheless have been revealed by God and are to be believed.” (Ibid., 208).  In other words, faith formed by charity transforms the will by allaying the strength of those appetitive obstacles that forestall love of God.  In turn, faith directs us to God and motivates us to embrace sacred teaching (ST IIaIIae 2.9 ad 3).

On this view of faith, the person who subordinates herself to God does so not as a result of divine coercion but by virtue of an infused disposition whereby she loves God.  In fact, we might argue that God’s grace makes a genuinely free response possible.  For grace curtails pride and enables us to grasp and fairly assess what the Christian faith proposes for belief (Jenkins, 209).  In doing so, it permits us to freely endorse those things that we in our sinful state would never be able—or want—to understand and embrace.  According to this view, God’s grace does not contravene the voluntary nature of our will.

c. Faith and Reason

It is clear from the preceding account of faith that Aquinas staunchly supports the use of argument in exonerating  those claims that are proposed for belief.  Indeed, the arguments offered in support of Christian claims often provide us with the motivation we sometimes need in order to embrace them.  But does the use of reasons or argument compromise the merit of faith?  Aquinas expresses the objection this way:  “faith is necessary [in order to assent to] divine things….  Therefore in this subject it is not permitted to investigate the truth [of divinely revealed realities] by reasoning” (De trinitate, 2.1 obj. 3).  He also quotes St. Gregory’s objection:  “ ‘Faith has no merit where human reason supplies proof.’ But it is wrong to do away with the merit of faith.  Therefore it is not right to investigate matters of faith by reason” (Ibid., obj. 5).  In short, human investigation into sacred doctrine threatens to render faith superfluous.  For if one were to offer a good argument for the truth of what God reveals, then there would be no need for us to exercise faith in regard to that truth.

Yet Aquinas insists that Christianity’s doctrinal truths—truths we are to embrace by faith—are often confirmed by “fitting arguments” (SCG I.6.1), and that faith can be strengthened by the use of reason (De trinitate, 2.1).  What sort of reasoning or argumentation does Aquinas have in mind?  He makes a distinction between demonstrative reasoning and persuasive reasoning.  As we saw earlier, demonstrative reasoning yields a conclusion that is undeniable for anyone who grasps the truth of the demonstration’s premises.  In these cases, believing the demonstration’s conclusion is not a voluntary affair.  If I know that the sum of all rectangles’ interior angles equals 360º and that a square is a rectangle, then I cannot help but believe that the sum of a square’s interior angles equals 360º.  In cases of demonstrative reasoning, knowledge of a demonstration’s premises is sufficient to guarantee assent to the demonstration’s conclusions  (De trinitate 2.1 ad 5).  Were a person to grasp the truth of sacred doctrine by means of this sort of reasoning, belief would be necessitated and the merit of faith destroyed (Ibid.).

Persuasive reasoning, on the other hand, does no such thing.  We might think of persuasive reasoning as playing an apologetic role vis-à-vis theological claims (Stump suggests something along these lines.  See 1991: 197).  In his own gloss on Aquinas, Jenkins suggests that “persuasive reasoning” consists of “credibility arguments” that corroborate the truth of what sacred scripture teaches but are ultimately unable “to move one to assent to the articles of faith” (Jenkins, 1997: 185-186).  In other words, the arguments in which persuasive reasoning consists may provide reasons for accepting certain doctrines, but they cannot compel acceptance of those doctrines.  One still needs the grace of faith in order to embrace them.  Whatever merits persuasive reasoning confers on sacred teaching, “it is the interior movement of grace and the Holy Spirit which is primary in bringing one to see that these truths  have been divinely revealed and are to be believed” (Ibid., 196).  This is why Aquinas insists that human investigation into matters of faith does not render faith superfluous or “deprive faith of its merit” (De trinitate 2.1 ad 5).

For more discussion, see the article Faith and Reason.

4. Christian Doctrine

A closer look at some central Christian doctrines is now in order.  The term “Christian doctrine” refers to the specific, developed teachings that are at the heart of Christian faith and practice.  And although there are many doctrines that constitute sacred teaching, at least two are foundational to Christianity and subject to thorough analysis by Aquinas.  These include the Incarnation and the Trinity.  Aquinas takes both of these doctrines to be essential to Christian teaching and necessary to believe in order to receive salvation (see ST IIaIIae 2.7 and 8, respectively).  For this reason it will be beneficial to explore what these doctrines assert.

a. Incarnation and Atonement

The doctrine of the Incarnation teaches that God literally and in history became human in the person of Jesus Christ.  The doctrine of the Incarnation further teaches that Christ is the complete and perfect union of two natures, human and divine.  The idea here is not that Jesus is some strange hybrid, a chimera of human and divine parts.  The idea rather is that in Christ there is a merger of two natures into one hypostasis—a subsisting individual composed of two discrete but complete essences (ST III 2.3).  In short, Christ is a single person who is fully human and fully divine;  he is God and man.  Aquinas' efforts to explicate and defend this doctrine are ingenious but may prove frustrating without a more advanced understanding of the metaphysical framework he employs (see Stump 2003 for a treatment of this subject).  Rather than pursue the complexities of that framework, we will instead address a different matter to which the Incarnation is intricately connected.

According to Christian teaching, human beings are estranged from God.  That estrangement is the result of original sin—a “heritable stain” we contract from our first parent, Adam (Catholic Encyclopedia, “Original Sin”;  Cf. ST IaIIae 81.1).  So understood, sin refers not to a specific immoral act but a spiritual wounding that diminishes the good of human nature (ST IaIIae 85.1 and 3).  Sin’s stain undermines our ability to deliberate well about practical matters; it hardens our wills toward evil; and it exacerbates the impetuosity of passion, thereby making virtuous activity more difficult (ST IaIIae 85.3).  Further, Christian doctrine states that we become progressively more corrupt as we yield to sinful tendencies over time.  Sinful choices produce corresponding habits, or vices, that reinforce hostility towards God and put beatitude further beyond our reach.  No amount of human effort can remedy this problem.  The damage wrought by sin prevents us from meriting divine favor or even wanting the sort of goods that which makes union with God possible.

The Incarnation makes reconciliation with God possible.  To understand this claim, we must consider another doctrine to which the Incarnation is inextricably tied, namely, the doctrine of the Atonement.  According to the doctrine of Atonement, God reconciles himself to human beings through Christ, whose suffering and death compensates for our transgressions (ST III 48.1).  In short, reconciliation with God is accomplished by means of Christ’s satisfaction for sin.  Yet this satisfaction does not consist in making reparations for past transgressions.  Rather it consists in God healing our wounded natures and making union with him possible. The most fitting way to accomplish this task was through the Incarnation (ST III 1.2).  From this perspective, satisfaction is more restorative than retributive.  As Eleonore Stump notes:  “the function of  satisfaction for Aquinas is not to placate a wrathful God … [but] to restore a sinner to a state of harmony with God by repairing or restoring in the sinner what sin has damaged” (Stump, 2003: 432).  Aquinas emphasizes the restorative nature of satisfaction by detailing the many blessings Christ’s Incarnation and atoning work afford.  A partial list is as follows:  the incarnation provides human beings with a tangible manifestation of God himself, thereby inspiring faith;  it prompts in us hope for salvation;  it demonstrates God’s love for human beings, and in turn kindles within us a love for God; correlatively, it produces in us sorrow for past sins and a desire to turn from them; it provides us a template of humility, constancy, obedience, and justice, all of which are required for salvation; and it merits “justifying grace” for human beings (ST III 1.2; 46.3;  Cf.  90.4).

This last benefit requires explanation.  As we saw in the previous section, our natures are corrupted by sin, resulting in a weakened inclination to act virtuously and obey God’s commandments.  Only a supernatural transformation of our recalcitrant wills can heal our corrupt nature and make us people who steadily trust, hope in, and love God as the source of our beatitude.  In short, Christian doctrine purports that we need God’s grace—a divinely infused quality that inclines us toward God.  This brief description of grace might suggest that it is an infused virtue much like faith, hope, and charity.  According to Aquinas, however, grace is not a virtue.   Rather, it is the infused virtues’ “principle and root”a disposition that is antecedently necessary in order to practice the virtues themselves (ST IaIIae 110.3;  110 ad 3).  We might be inclined to think of God’s grace as a transformative quality that enables us to desire our supernatural end, fulfill God’s commandments, and avoid sin (ST IaIIae 109.2, 4, and 8).

This account helps explain why grace is said to justify sinners. Justification consists not only in the remittance of sins, but in a transmutation whereby our wills are supernaturally directed away from morally deficient ends and towards God.  In short, justification produces within us a certain “rectitude of order” whereby our passions are subordinate to reason and reason is subordinate to God as our proper end (ST IaIIae 113.1;  113.1 ad 2).  In this way God, by means of his grace, heals our fallen nature, pardons sin, and makes us worthy of eternal life.

Now, remission of sin and moral renovation cannot occur apart from the work God himself accomplishes through Christ. According to Aquinas, forgiveness and righteousness are made possible through Christ’s passion, or the love and obedience he exemplified through his suffering and death (ST III 48.2). Thus he describes Christ’s suffering and death as instruments of God’s grace; for through them we are freed from sin and reconciled to God (ST IaIIae 112.1 ad 1; ST III 48.1; 49.1-4). But how exactly does Christ’s suffering and death merit the remission of sin and unify us with God? Briefly: Christ’s loving obedience and willingness to suffer for justice’s sake merited God’s favor. Yet such favor was not limited to Christ. For “by suffering out of love and obedience, Christ gave more to God than what was required to compensate for the offense of the whole human race” (ST III 48.2; Cf. 48.4). That is to say, so great was his love and obedience that he accrued a degree of merit that was sufficient to atone for everyone’s sin (Ibid.). On this account, God accepts Christ’s perfect expression of love and obedience as a more than adequate satisfaction for sin, thereby discharging us from the debt of punishment incurred by our unfaithfulness and lack of love. But again, the aim of satisfaction is not to appease God through acts of restitution but to renovate our wills and make possible a right relationship with him (Stump, 432). After all, satisfaction for sin does us little good if Christ’s actions do not serve to change us by transforming the vicious inclinations that alienate us from God. Thus we ought not to look at Christ simply as an instrument by which our sins are wiped clean, but as one whose sacrificial efforts produce in us a genuine love for God and make possible the very union we desire (ST III 49.1; 49.3 ad 3).

The preceding survey of the Incarnation and the Atonement will undoubtedly raise further questions that we cannot possibly address here.  For example, one issue this article has not addressed is the role of Christian sacraments in conferring grace and facilitating the believer’s incorporation into God’s life (see, for example, ST III 48.2 ad 2; 62.1 and 2.  For a careful treatment of this issue, see Stump:  2003, chapter 15).  Instead, this brief survey attempts only a provisional account of how the Incarnation makes atonement for sin and reconciliation with God possible.

b. Trinity

This section will focus on the doctrine of the Trinity (with all the typical caveats implied, of course).  Aquinas' definition of the Trinity is in full accord with the orthodox account of what Christians traditionally believe about God.  According to that account, God is one.  That is, his essence is one of supreme unity and simplicity.  Yet the doctrine also states that there are three distinct persons:  Father, Son, and Holy Spirit.  By distinct, Aquinas means that the persons of the Trinity are real individuals and not, say, the same individual understood under different descriptions.  Moreover, each of the three persons is identical to the divine essence.  That is, each person of the Trinity is equally to God.  The doctrine is admittedly confounding.  But if it is true, then it should be internally coherent.  In fact, Aquinas insists that, although we cannot prove the doctrine through our own demonstrative efforts, we can nevertheless show that this and other doctrines known through the light of faith are not contradictory (de Trinitate, 1.1 ad 5; 1.3).

Aquinas' exposition of the Trinity endeavors to avoid two notable heresies:  Arianism and Sabellianism.  In short, Arianism denies Christ’s full divinity.  It teaches that Christ was created by God at a point in time and therefore not co-eternal with him.  Although Arianism insists that Christ is divine, his creaturely dependence on God implies that he does not share God’s essence.   In short, God and Christ are distinct substances.  What follows from this teaching is that Christ is “a second, or inferior God, standing midway between the First Cause and creatures; as Himself made out of nothing, yet as making all things else; as existing before the worlds of the ages; and as arrayed in all divine perfections except the one which was their stay and foundation” (Catholic Encyclopedia, “Arianism”).  The other heresy, Sabellianism, attempts to preserve divine unity by denying any real distinction in God.  According to this doctrine, the names “Father,” “Son,” and “Holy Spirit” refer not to discrete persons but different manifestations of the same divine being.  Aquinas' account attempts to avoid these heresies by affirming that the persons of the Trinity are distinct without denying the complete unity of the divine essence.

How does Aquinas go about defending the traditional doctrine?  The challenge, of course, is to show that the claim

(1) the persons of the God-head are really distinct

is consistent with the claim that

(2) God is one

In an effort to reconcile (1) and (2), Aquinas argues that there are relations in God.  For example, we find in God the relational notion of paternity (which implies fatherhood) and filiation (which implies sonship) (ST Ia 28.1 sed contra).  Paternity and filiation imply different things.  And while I may be both a father and a son, these terms connote a real relation between distinct  persons (me, my son, and my father).  Thus if there is paternity and filiation in God, then there must be a real distinction of persons that the divine essence comprises (ST Ia 28.3).  We should note here that Aquinas avoids using the terms “diversity” and “difference” in this context because such terms contravene the doctrine of simplicity (ST Ia 31.2).  The notion of distinction, however, does not contravene the doctrine of simplicity because (according to Aquinas) we can have a distinction of persons while maintaining divine unity.

This last claim is obviously the troubling one.  How can we have real distinction within a being that is perfectly one?  The answer to this question requires we look a bit more closely at what Aquinas means by relation. The idea of relation goes back at least as far as Aristotle (for a good survey of medieval analyses of relations, see Brower, 2005).  For Aristotle and his commentators, the term relation refers to a property that allies the thing that has it with something else.  Thus he speaks of a relation as that which makes something of, than, or to some other thing (Aristotle, Categories, Book 7, 6b1).  For example, what is larger is larger than something else;  to have knowledge is to have knowledge of something;  to incline is to incline toward something;  and so forth (Ibid. 6b5).

Aquinas' attempt to make sense of the Trinity involves use of (or perhaps, as Brower notes, a significant departure from) Aristotle’s idea of relation (Brower, 2005).  On the one hand, Aquinas' understanding of relation as it applies to creatures mirrors Aristotle’s view:  a relation is an accidental property that signifies a connection to something else (ST Ia 28.1).  On the other hand, the notion of relation need not denote a property that allies different substances.  It can also refer to distinctions that are internal to a substance.  This second construal is the way Aquinas understands the notion of relation as it applies to God.  For there is within God a relation of persons, each of which enjoys a characteristic the others do not have.  As we noted before, God the Father has the characteristic of paternity, God the Son has the characteristic of filiation, and so on.  These characteristics are unique to each person, thus creating a kind of opposition that connotes real distinction (ST Ia 28.3).

Care is required before proceeding here.  Each of the aforementioned relations not only inhere in the divine essence, they are identical to it in the sense that each member of the Trinity is identical to God (ST Ia 28.2 and 29.4).  From this abbreviated account we see that relation as it exists in God is not, as it is for creatures, an accidental property.  For the relation, being identical to God, does not add to or modify the divine substance in any way.  Aquinas says:  “whatever has an accidental existence in creatures, when considered as transferred to God, has a substantial existence; for there is no accident in God; since all in Him is His essence. So, in so far as relation has an accidental existence in creatures, relation really existing in God has the existence of the divine essence in no way distinct therefrom” (ST Ia 28.2).  Seen this way, it is somewhat misleading to say that relation is something that “inheres in” God;  for the relation is identical to God himself (Emery, 2007:  94).

This woefully truncated account of Aquinas' position presents a more detailed articulation of the very claim he needs to explain.  One can still ask:  how can God be a perfect unity and still comprise a plurality of distinct persons?  Aquinas is aware of the worry.  For “if in God there exists a number of persons, then there must be whole and part in God, which is inconsistent with the divine simplicity” (ST Ia 30.1 obj. 4;  cf. ST Ia 39.1 obj. 1).  Aquinas recognizes that most people will find it difficult to imagine how something can have within itself multiple relations and at the same time be an unqualified unity.

In order to show how one might have a plurality while preserving unity, consider the following analogy.  Using Aristotle’s account of material constitution as a point of departure, Jeffery Brower and Michael Rea suggest that a bronze statue is constituted by two discrete substances:  a lump of bronze and a statue.  Although the lump of bronze and the statue are distinct things, “they are numerically one material object.  Likewise, the persons of the Trinity are three distinct persons but numerically one God” (Brower and Rea, 2005: 69).  Although the authors do not have Aquinas' account of divine relations in mind when using this analogy, we may cautiously avail ourselves of their insights.  If we can think of the lump of bronze and the configuration by which the bronze is a statue as a relation of two things, then we can see that relation does not concern anything that is not identical to the object (the bronze statue).  Such an account is similar to the one Aquinas has in mind when attempting reconcile (1) and (2).  For although each person of the Trinity is distinct from each other, each person is not distinct from God (ST Ia 28.2;  cf. 39.1).

Some readers might object to the use of such analogies.  In the present case, the relations that inhere in God are persons, not formally discrete features of an artifact.  Moreover, the analogy does not adequately capture the precise nature of the relations as they exist in God.  For Aquinas, the divine relations are relations of procession.  Here Aquinas takes himself to be affirming sacred teaching, which tells us that Jesus “proceeded and came forth” from the Father (John 8:42) and that the Holy Spirit proceeds from both the Father and the Son (according to the Catholic expression of the Nicene Creed).  Aquinas is careful not to suggest that the form of procession mentioned here does not consist in the production of separate beings.  Jesus does not, as Arius taught, proceed from God as a created being.  Nor does the Holy Spirit proceed from Father and Son as a creature of both.  Were this the case, neither the Son nor the Holy Spirit would be truly God (ST Ia 27.1).  Instead, the procession to which Aquinas refers does not denote an outward act at all;  procession is internal to God and not distinct from him.

In order to make sense of this idea, Aquinas employs the analogy of understanding, which consists in an interior process, namely, the conceptualization of an object understood and signified by speech (Ibid.).  He refers to this process as intelligible emanation. Intelligible concepts proceed but are not distinct from the agent who conceives them.  This notion is central to Aquinas' account of how Father and Son relate to each other.  For the Son does not proceed from the Father as a separate being but as an intelligible conception of God himself.  Thus Aquinas describes the Son as the “supreme perfection of God, the divine Word [who] is of necessity perfectly one with the source from which he proceeds” (ST Ia 27.1 ad 2;  Cf. 27.2).  To put the matter another way, the divine Word is the likeness of God himself—a concept emanating from God’s own self-understanding.  These words may sound cryptic to the casual reader, but Davies helps render them comprehensible.  He suggests that the Son’s relationship to God is not unlike our self-conception’s relationship to ourselves.  For “there is similarity between me and my [self-image] insofar as my concept of myself really corresponds to what I am” (Davies, 196).  Similarly, Aquinas thinks of the Son “as the concept in the mind of the one conceiving of himself.  In God’s case this means that the Father brings forth the Son, who is like him insofar as he is properly understood, and who shares the divine nature since God and his understanding are the same”  (Ibid.).

Aquinas' attempt to render the doctrine of the Trinity coherent is controversial and involves complexities not addressed here.  Yet I imagine Aquinas himself would not be surprised by the consternation some readers might express in response to his attempts to illuminate and defend this and other sacred teachings.  After all, Aquinas contends that knowledge of the divine nature will, if acquired by our own investigative efforts, be quite feeble (SCG IV.1.4;  ST IIaIIae 2.3).  And this is why God, in his goodness, must reveal to us things that transcend human reason.  But even once these things are revealed, our understanding of them will not be total or immediate.  What is required is a form of intellectual training whereby we gradually come to comprehend that which is difficult to grasp in an untutored state (Jenkins: 219).  And even those who reach a proper state of intellectual maturation will not be able to comprehend these mysteries fully, which may explain why attempts to clarify and defend these doctrines can produce so much debate.  Yet Aquinas expresses the hope that what we cannot understand completely now will be apprehended more perfectly after this life, when, according to Christian doctrine, we will see God face to face (SCG IV.1.4-5).

5. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Thomas Aquinas, St.. Compendium of Theology. 1947. ST. Louis MO: B. Herder, 1947.
  • Thomas Aquinas, St. Questiones de vertitate (QDV). 1954. Trans. Robert W. Mulligan, S.J. Henry Regnery Company.
  • Thomas Aquinas, St. Summa contra gentiles (SCG), vol. I. 1975. Trans. Anton Pegis. Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press.
  • Thomas Aquinas, St. Summa contra gentiles (SCG), vol. IV. 1975. Trans. Charles J. O’Neil. Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press.
  • Thomas Aquinas, St. Summa theologiae (ST). 1981. Trans. Fathers of the English Dominican Province. Westminster: Christian Classics.
  • Thomas Aquinas, St. Super Boethium de Trinitate (de Trinitate). 1993. In Aquinas On Faith and Reason, ed. Stephen Brown.  Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Brower, Jeffery and Michael Rea.  2005.  “Material Constitution and the Trinity.” Faith and Philosophy 22 (January): 57-76.
  • Copleston, Fredrick. 1955.  Aquinas. Baltimore: Penguin Books.
  • Davies, Brian.  1992.  The Thought of Thomas Aquinas.  New York:  Oxford University Press.
  • Dawkins, Richard.  1990 (2nd edition). The Selfish Gene.  Oxford University Press.
  • Emery, Gilles.  2006 (2nd edition). Trinity in Aquinas.  Ann Arbor: Sapientia Press.
  • Emery, Gilles.  2007.  The Trinitarian Theology of St. Thomas Aquinas.  Oxford:  Oxford University Press.
  • Floyd, Shawn. 2006. “Achieving a Science of Sacred Doctrine,” The Heythrop Journal.  January, 47: 1-15.
  • Hibbs, Thomas.  1995.  Dialectic and Narrative in Aquinas: An Interpretation of Summa Contra Gentiles.  Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press.
  • Hibbs, Thomas.  1998.  “Kretzmann’s Theism vs. Aquinas' Theism:  Interpreting the Summa Contra Gentiles,” The Thomist.  October 62: 603-22.
  • Jenkins, John.  1998. Knowledge and Faith in Thomas Aquinas.  Cambridge:  Cambridge University Press.
  • Kretzmann, Norman.  1997.  The Metaphysics of Theism:  Aquinas' Natural Theology in Summa Contra Gentiles I.  Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Penelhum, Terence.  1977.  “The Analysis of Faith in Thomas Aquinas,” Religious Studies 3.
  • Ross, James. 1985.  “Aquinas on Belief and Knowledge,” in Essay Honoring Allan B. Wolter, eds. W.A. Frank and G.J. Etzkorn.  St. Bonaventure: The Franciscan Institute.
  • Stump, Eleonore.  1991.  “Aquinas on Faith and Goodness” in Being and Goodness:  The Concept of the Good in Metaphysics and Philosophical Theology, ed. Scott MacDonald.  Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
  • Stump, Eleonore.  2003. Aquinas.  New York: Routledge.  The chapter on the Atonement was especially helpful in writing section 4a of this article.
  • te Velde, Rudi.  2006.  Aquinas on God: The Divine Science of the Summa Theologiae. Burlington:  Ashgate Publishing Company.
  • Wippel, John. 2006.  “The Five Ways,” in Aquinas' Summa Theologiae:  Critical Essays, ed. Brain Davies.  Lanham:  Rowman & Littlefield Publishers.

c. Internet Resources

  • Berry, William. “Arianism,” The Catholic Encyclopedia (2003 Edition).
  • Brower, Jeffery.  2005.  “Medieval Theories of Relations, in The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (2007 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.).
  • Valencia, William.  2006.  “Divine Simplicity,” in The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (2007 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.).

Author Information

Shawn Floyd
Malone University

Medieval Theories of Practical Reason

Practical reason is the employment of reason in service of living a good life, and the great medieval thinkers all gave accounts of it. Practical reason is reasoning about, or better toward, an action, and an action always has a goal or end, this end being understood to be in some sense good. The medievals generally concurred that it was always in some way directed toward the agent’s ultimate goal or final end (although there were important differences in how the agent’s relation to the final end was conceived).

In every medieval account, we find important roles for the intellect and the will—for the intellect in identifying goods to be honored and pursued, and for the will in tending toward such goods. Medieval accounts always paid attention to the relationship between practical reason and the moral trinity of happiness, law, and virtue. Perhaps the most important difference between these accounts is that some philosophers assign primacy to the intellect but others assign it to the will. This difference has led historians to identify schools of thought called intellectualism and voluntarism.

This article traces some of the main lines of medieval thought about practical reason, from its roots in Aristotle and Augustine through some of its most interesting expressions in Aquinas and Scotus, the ablest exponents, respectively, of intellectualism and voluntarism. The article points out the important differences among theorists, but also highlights the themes common to all the medieval, and it indicates some points of contact with contemporary work on practical reason, including debates about particularism and internalism.

Table of Contents

  1. Precursors: Aristotle and Augustine
    1. Aristotle
    2. Augustine
    3. Intellectualism and Voluntarism
  2. Intellectualist Theory: Aquinas
    1. The Interaction of Intellect and Will in Generating Action
    2. The Practical Syllogism
    3. Happiness, Law, and Virtue
    4. Final Comments
  3. Voluntarist Theory: Scotus
    1. Freedom of the Will
    2. Synderesis, Conscience, and the Natural Law
    3. The Non-Teleological Character of Scotus’ Thought
    4. Note on Ockham
  4. Medieval and Modern
    1. The Current Influence of Aquinas and Scotus
    2. The Medievals and Particularism
    3. The Medievals and Internalism
  5. Conclusion: Common Themes among the Medievals
  6. References and Further Reason
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1.Precursors: Aristotle and Augustine

The two most important influences upon medieval thought about practical reason were Aristotle and St. Augustine, and this first section identifies a few of the key ideas they bequeathed to their successors.

a. Aristotle

Aristotle’s theory is teleological and eudaimonist: All action is undertaken for an end, and our proximate ends, when we act rationally, form a coherent hierarchical structure leading up to our final end of eudaimonia (happiness, flourishing). Although we presuppose rather than reason about our final end formally considered—it is that which we pursue for its own sake, and for the sake of which we pursue all else; it is that which makes life worthwhile—practical reason does help us work out the correct way to think about just what that final end is, and about how to move toward it. Reason does this by means of the practical syllogism: The major premise identifies the end, some good recognized as worthy of pursuit; the minor premise interprets the agent’s situation in relation to the end; the conclusion is characteristically a choice leading directly to action that pursues means to the end (for example, Some pleasant relaxation would be good right now; reading this novel would be pleasant and relaxing; I shall read it (and straightaway I commence reading)). The work practical reason does in formulating the minor premise and identifying the means is called deliberation. While we cannot deliberate about the end identified in the major premise as an end, we can deliberate about it under its aspect as a means to some further end. Thus practical reason can (although seldom will it explicitly do so in practice) take the form of a chain of syllogisms, with the major premise of the first identifying the final end to be pursued, and the conclusion both identifying the means to that end and supplying the major premise of the next (now serving as a proximate end), until we finally reach down to something to be done here and now (the means to the most proximate end). Here is a compressed example: I should flourish as a human being, and my flourishing requires the practice of civic virtue, so I should practice civic virtue; I should practice civic virtue, in my circumstances civic virtue requires me to enlist in the army to defend my city, so I should enlist; I should enlist, and here is a recruiter to whom I must speak in order to enlist; I choose to speak to the recruiter.

Notice that in this syllogism the premises do not mention desire—the majors do not state “I want X,” but rather that X is a good to be pursued. Yet the conclusion does mention desire, or rather is a desire (for that is what choice is, deliberated desire). This is not an oversight on Aristotle's part. Although he holds that reason and desire work together to produce action, he insists that desire naturally tends to what cognition identifies as good—as he puts it at Metaphysics 1072a29, “desire is consequent upon opinion rather than opinion on desire, for the thinking is the starting point.” Reason serves as the formal cause of action by identifying the actions (determining what “form” our actions should take) leading to the apprehended good, which is the final cause or end of action; desire serves as the efficient cause, putting the man in motion toward the end. So when a prospective end is recognized as good, a desire for it follows. The practical syllogism serves to transmit the desire for the end identified by reason as good down to means identified by reason as the appropriate way to the end.

Yet, because cognition includes sense perception, things other than those identified by reason can be presented to desire as good (as any dieter knows when offered dessert). This allows Aristotle to propose a solution to the problem of akrasia or “weakness of will,” the choosing of something we know to be bad—to put it crudely, we know it is bad, but it looks good. For reasoning to be effectively practical, and for practice to be rational, the desires must be in line with reason; for the desires to be consistently in line with reason, the moral virtues, which “train” the emotions to bring them into line with reason, are necessary. When the moral virtues, together with prudence, are present, Aristotle takes it that reasoning well and acting accordingly will follow naturally (we can speak of virtue as “second nature”).

b.  Augustine

The idea of virtuous action becoming natural is one of the points on which Augustine will disagree with Aristotle. He learns from his own experience (for example, in his robbing of the pear tree recounted in Confessions II) and from his reflections on the sin of the angels (see On Free Choice of the Will III) that the will can choose what the intellect rejects. Although the intellect is required for willing in the sense that it presents objects as good to the will, willing has no cause other than the will itself. Augustine, unlike some later Augustinians, is a eudaimonist, seeing our final end as eternal life in peace, that is, in right relation to and enjoyment of God (see The City of God XIX). Yet it should be noted that, drawing on his own experience and the writings of St. Paul, he identifies “two loves” of the will, love of God and love of self, and holds that the struggle between these two for ascendancy is the key to each human life, and indeed to history. No trace of such a struggle is to be found in Aristotle; nor   is there any such role for faith as we find in Augustine. Both in Confessions XI and in The City of God XIX Augustine chronicles the woes of temporal human existence, and the impossibility of finding peace, our final end, during our life on earth. It is thus in some sense reasonable for us to turn humbly to faith in God as our only hope for salvation. This turning, or conversion, requires an act of willed submission to God. Only after this can the intellect know, by faith, the true character of our final end, and thus only after such willing can practical reason become truly informed as to how to act. The need for conversion brings one more un-Aristotelian idea into the picture, that of obedience to divine law.

c.  Intellectualism and Voluntarism

Aristotle’s account of practical reason could be characterized as intellectualist, not   because he ignores the very important role of desire, but because reason plays the leading role, and desire is naturally inclined to follow reason (“desire is consequent upon opinion … for the thinking is the starting point”). Further, although Aristotle employs the concept of rational wish, there is serious debate as to whether this can rightly be identified with what the medievals, following Augustine, call the will. By contrast, Augustine may be termed a voluntarist, not because reason is unimportant, but because with him it is the will that plays the primary role. As we have seen, even in the absence of passion, the will may choose contrary to the judgment of the intellect, and it is only by willed humility that we can come to know our true final end by faith.

Throughout much of the Christian Middle Ages, Augustine’s influence predominates. And although much important work was done on topics highly relevant to practical reasoning—for example, passages in Peter Lombard’s Sentences, and the work of  St. Anselm on the will and of Abelard on ethics—practical reasoning itself was not generally treated in a rigorous and systematic way. But in the twelfth century, translations of Aristotle’s works, together with Muslim and Jewish commentaries, began to flow into Western Europe, and to gain in influence, eventually rivaling or surpassing the importance of Augustine’s thought. These thinkers do treat practical reasoning in rigorous fashion, and under their influence, so too do the great thinkers of the High Middle Ages. In doing so, all draw on both Aristotle and Augustine, and although it is common practice to identify some as “Aristotelians” and “intellectualists,” and others as “Augustinians” and “voluntarists,” this does run the risk of oversimplifying. The reader should keep in mind that there is no one account of the relation between intellect and will that all intellectualists held, nor one opposed account that all voluntarists held. Instead, scholars sort thinkers according to whether they hold certain characteristic theses concerning such questions as these: Is the intellect or the will the higher power? Is the will a passive power (a “moved mover”) or an active one (a “self-mover”)? What sort of cause does the intellect exert on the will’s choice—does it specify the act of will, or can the will act independently and control its own choices (and can it act contrary to judgment)? A metaphor commonly used by those now classified as voluntarists was that of the Lord and the Lampbearer: The will is the lord, deciding where to go; the intellect contributes to the decision,  but in the same manner as the servant who lights the way (or rather the possible ways) with a lamp (see for example Henry of Ghent, Quodlibet Iq14). Intellectualists, by contrast, would see the intellect as the lord, and the will as the lieutenant or executive officer.

In the intellectualist camp we can probably include St. Albert (see the first McCluskey entry for a discussion) and John of Paris;  in the voluntarist camp, St. Bonaventure and Henry of Ghent. Others, such as Giles of Rome, occupy a position in the disputed middle ground (see Kent for an intellectualist reading of Giles; Eardley for a moderately voluntarist reading). The following sections will focus on the two figures who are arguably the most important and influential thinkers of the High Middle Ages, taking Aquinas as a representative of intellectualism, and Scotus as a representative of voluntarism. But it should be kept in mind that Aquinas treats Augustine as an authority and has a much more robust conception of the will than does Aristotle, and likewise that Scotus draws heavily upon Aristotle and insists upon a very important role for the intellect.

2.  Intellectualist Theory: Aquinas

Like both Aristotle and Augustine, St. Thomas Aquinas (1225-1274) is a eudaimonist; like Augustine he takes seriously both obedience to divine law and the role of the will in the genesis of action; yet like Aristotle he is an intellectualist. (This is generally accepted, but it should be noted that some scholars have argued for more somewhat more voluntarist readings of Aquinas than that offered below. See Eardley and Westberg for sources, discussion, and criticism of these interpretations.) For Aquinas, practical reasoning plays out in a dynamic exchange between intellect and will, an exchange in which intellect always has the first word (reason being the first principle of human action), but in which the will plays a key role and the agent remains free.

a.  The Interaction of Intellect and Will in Generating Action

For Aquinas, the will tends naturally toward the good, but to act it must have the good presented to it by reason in its practical capacity. Further, after apprehending and willing the good, the agent must decide whether and how to pursue it, which involves a process of collaboration between intellect and will. Let us begin with an example, making use of Ralph McInerny’s immortal character, Fifi LaRue. In the midst of a bad day, Fifi sees a travel poster advertising a Roman holiday, apprehends “how nice that would be,” and forms a wish to go. She considers the idea as befitting, and enjoys it. Nothing seems to stand in the way; the trip would be delightful and cause no problems; she forms the intention to go. But she must take counsel as to how she could accomplish it. Due to time constraints, she must fly, but could take a bus or taxi to the airport; she consents to both. Yet the bus would be so crowded … let it be the taxi then, she judges, and so chooses. Here is a taxi; she must hail it by raising her arm. So she commands, and so uses her arm. The taxi pulls up, and off she goes.

This example involves the steps and terms Aquinas spells out in questions 8-17 of the prima secundae (the first part of the second part of the Summa theologiae),  and we should now look at some of the details of this complex discussion: The intellect apprehends something as good and thereby presents it to the will, which then wills or wishes that good as an end—call this simple willing. (Strictly speaking, it would be more proper to say the agent apprehends the good by means of her intellect and simply wills it by means of her will; this is always what Aquinas means, although for convenience he often speaks of the intellect apprehending and so forth.) This does not yet mean that the agent pursues the good; she may decide not to for a variety of reasons—perhaps it is pleasant but sinful, and she immediately rejects it—or may be as yet undecided. She may then continue to consider the good, apprehend it as befitting in some ways, and, in a second act of will regarding the possible end, enjoy it (while we perfectly enjoy only an end possessed, we may imperfectly enjoy or entertain the idea of possessing it). Again, actual pursuit need not follow—perhaps the good is befitting but not currently feasible (Fifi, perhaps, lacks the money). Finally, the agent may actually undertake to pursue this good as an end, to tend toward it, and this act of will Aquinas calls intention (and here again, Aquinas is explicit that an act of reason precedes this act of will; cf. q12a1ad3).

Now intending the good as an end, the agent must determine how best to pursue it—she must decide upon means to the end. When the means are not immediately obvious, the agent deliberates or takes counsel, in which reason seeks out acceptable ways to the end; such ways being found the will then consents to them. Reason must then issue a judgment (q14a1) as to which is preferable, followed by the act of will called choice (q13, q15a3ad3). So, Fifi took counsel as to how to reach the airport, identifies and accepts two ways (bus or taxi), then judges the taxi superior and so chooses that means. But in considering how to get from America to Rome, she is able to skip the counsel/consent stage because the means (flying) are immediately obvious (she has no time for sailing).

The choice having been made, it is time to execute. Here again we see the same pattern of an act of intellect, command, followed by an act of will, use, whereby the will employs faculties of the soul, parts of the body, or material objects to make the choice effective. So when the taxi draws near, Fifi sees that she must wave, and commands “this (waving) is to be done.”  This command informs, or gives exact shape to, her already present will to take a taxi (her choice). Her will then uses her arm, puts it in motion.

Now the process described is a complex one, having as many as twelve steps from the initial apprehension of a good down to use. Do we really go through all of this? Aquinas does not mean that we consciously rehearse all the steps every time we perform an action (just as we do not consciously rehearse rules of grammar in articulating a thought). The twelve-step process is a logical reconstruction of the role of intellect and will in generating action. The steps are those we could consciously rehearse, and perhaps sometimes do (if facing a complicated matter, say, or if doggedly pressed for an explanation or justification of a past action). Usually, our actual practical reasoning will be much more concise. Daniel Westberg and others have argued that we should understand Aquinas to have in mind a streamlined version of the process centered around intention (apprehension and intention), decision (judgment and choice), and execution (command and use), with intellect and will working in unison at each stage. Other acts mentioned by Aquinas, such as counsel and consent, may serve auxiliary roles in complex situations.

Westberg stresses that we should not take Aquinas to mean that at each stage intellect renders its judgment and then the will decides whether or not to follow it—as we will see, this is the way of the voluntarists. Instead, the will naturally tends toward the good presented to it by the intellect at each stage. So for example in discussing whether choice is an act of intellect or of will, Aquinas says choice “is materially an act of the will, but formally an act of the reason” (q13a1)—roughly, the intellect in presenting some particular thing or action as good “forms” or makes specific the will’s general tendency toward the good (Aquinas follows Aristotle in maintaining that, like substances, accidents, including actions, can be analyzed in terms of form and matter). It is because the act of choice is completed by the will (judgment alone is not yet choice) that Aquinas is prepared to call it an act of will. Yet there is a real sense in which the stage Westberg calls “decision” comprises one act of the reasoning agent, an act whose form derives from reason and whose matter is supplied by will.

Voluntarists will charge that here the intellect is determining the will, which is thus not free. Now Aquinas calls that free which “retains the power of being inclined to various things” (Iaq83a1); a subject is free if it has this power. A rock is not free just because it can be inclined to heat or chill by the external power of fire or ice. Aquinas’s implied response to the voluntarist charge in the course of his discussion of choice is that the act of choice is free because the judgment that forms it is free, and the judgment is free because in considering any particular good, reason can focus on how it is good or on how it is lacking in goodness, leading to a judgment for or against it (q13a6). Worth noting, too, is that the will (and those other affective powers, the passions) play a role in attracting or diverting the attention of reason during the counsel it takes prior to judgment. But Aquinas’s more complete response would be that, strictly, it is not the will or reason that is free; the person is free in making the judgment and thus in making the choice the judgment informs. The intellect does not make the judgment, the person—the willing and feeling, as well as thinking, person—makes it by means of his intellect. The person is the subject that “retains the power” of, say, sitting closer to or further from the fire and thus being hot or cold; he exercises this power by means of his faculties of reason and will.

All of this shows how things can in many ways be more complicated, and less mechanical, than the initial description of Fifi’s pursuit of a Roman holiday suggested. One especially important factor, just touched on, is the reflexivity of both intellect and will. The will, for example, uses both intellect and itself throughout the process of deliberation (see q16a4c&ad3). In reaching her judgment, Fifi focused on the bus being crowded, but if her affections were more attuned to saving money, she might have focused instead on its economy. Further, she could at any point consider whether she should deliberate further and decide whether or not to do so. There is a potentially infinite regress here, but not an actual one. In taking counsel, having consented to taking the bus, she could yield to impatience and hop on the bus she sees rather than thinking further and realizing that a taxi would be better. Neither the bus nor the taxi, nor for that matter any other means or particular good in this life, is a perfect good. Thus none of them determine reason in its favor. Our judgment, and thus our choice, remain free. This highlights one reason Aquinas can be called an intellectualist, namely that he identifies reason as the source of freedom (see Iaq59a3: “wherever there is intellect, there is free-will”). But again, if this seems, paradoxically, to locate freedom in reason rather than will, it is well to remember that Aquinas’s talk of the intellect doing this, and the will that, is all shorthand for the person acting by means of each faculty. It is the person, not her faculties, who judges and chooses; and does both freely.

b.  The Practical Syllogism

But how does such reasoning relate to the Aristotelian notion of the practical syllogism Aquinas adopts? The intellectual acts regarding, and the pursuant intention of, the end supply the major premise (say, “I should go to Rome.”). The minor premise is supplied by deliberation, resulting in judgment and choice (“Taking a cab to the airport is the best way to Rome.”). This may take a major premise-minor premise form as above, but often the deliberation of the agent would be better represented as a longer argument with several premises, or as an iterated series of two-premise arguments finally reaching down to the concrete action. In this case, the means to the end initially chosen would then become the object of intention as a proximate end (q12a2), and counsel would be taken as to the means to that end, and so forth, until something that can be done here and now is reached (much as we saw above in the discussion of Aristotle).

Two questions present themselves at this point: What sort of reasoning goes into the formation of intentions, and how is this reasoning, and the reasoning involved in counsel, done well or ill? Sketching an answer to these questions requires a discussion of happiness, law, and virtue.

c.  Happiness, Law, and Virtue

Aquinas agrees with Aristotle that we have a final end, and with Augustine that it is not to be attained in this life (it is not a Roman holiday, unless perhaps in a very metaphorical sense). Using the term "happiness” is a potentially misleading, but common, translation of beatitude. Blessedness or flourishing would be better, for in fact our final end is our completion or perfection. Aquinas takes it that we all agree, or would agree upon reflection, on that. There is neither need nor room for practical reasoning about it. Yet we disagree over that in which it consists: one says wealth, another power, another (Fifi, perhaps) pleasure. And here we can reason: The mere fact that Aquinas wrote the first five questions of the prima secundae shows that he thought so. There he argues that because the will wills the good universally, and only God is universally good, our final end is attained in virtuous activity culminating in the right relation to God (although we may not know that the happiness we seek can be found only in and with God), which consists principally in loving contemplation and secondarily in obedient service. Only this perfects our nature as rational creatures. Although Aquinas agrees with Augustine that this end can be attained, or even adequately understood, only by God’s grace, Aquinas takes it that we do tend naturally (even if inadequately) toward it, and that its attainment fulfills, as well as transcends, our nature (“Grace does not destroy nature but perfects it” Iaq1a8ad2). What reason is able to make out about our final end, then, is reliable and authoritative, even if always incomplete.

There is a long-standing controversy in Aquinas scholarship concerning the relationship between what Aquinas calls imperfect and perfect beatitude: Do we have a natural final end of humanly virtuous activity and a distinct supernatural final end of contemplation of and friendship with God? Or do we have just one final end that is naturally unattainable? Here readers are referred to Bradley for a very thorough discussion of the issues involved.

Because by our nature we have a final end, any other end we have (going to Rome, perhaps) could be reconsidered in its light, and since everything we do is (perhaps unconsciously) done for the sake of the final end (Ia-IIaeq1a6), every other good we pursue, though seen as an end, is also a means to our final end, and under this aspect can be deliberated about, evaluated, and judged appropriate or not. In this sense, ends too are objects of counsel and judgment (q14a2). Fifi might adopt the end of going to Rome capriciously, but she might also stand back and take counsel about it under its aspect of a means to her conception of her final end. That is the sort of reasoning that can go into the formation of intentions. To see how Aquinas thinks such reasoning, as well as the reasoning about means, should be done, we must look at how his discussion of the final end relates to his discussion of the natural law.

As natural creatures, we have a natural inclination (in fact, an ordered set of natural inclinations) toward our perfection as human beings. As rational creatures, we can understand and endorse these inclinations, and articulate them into principles of practical reason, which are at the same time precepts of the natural law. How so? As Pamela Hall and Jean Porter have argued, the process of articulation involves a reflective, and developing, grasp of human nature and its tendencies, including an understanding of it and them as good. This understanding is ultimately founded on the recognition that human nature is created and directed by God, Goodness itself (this recognition can be achieved, however imperfectly, by means of natural knowledge of God). This allows the articulated principles to meet the criteria of law (q90a4): They are ordinances of reason (our own, and ultimately God’s) for the common good (due to our social nature), made by Him who has care of the community (again, God), and promulgated (they are made known, or knowable, to us through our natural inclinations). So although the precepts of the natural law ultimately derive their authority from God, they can be known independently of any knowledge of God—as Bradley puts it, they are “metaphysically theonomous” but “logically autonomous”)—and knowledge of them certainly does not require revelation.

Briefly setting out the inclinations and some of the precepts should illustrate this process of articulation, and at the same time give some indication of how it is connected with our pursuit of our final end. Like all things, we are naturally inclined toward our own good or perfection (good is that which all things seek), and thus as being is the first thing apprehended by reason simply, good is the first thing apprehended by reason as practical, or as directed toward action. And Aquinas takes it that, just as a grasp of the meaning of being and non-being leads naturally to knowledge of the principle of noncontradiction, so a grasp of good and evil leads to knowledge of the first principle of practical reason, good is to be done and pursued, and evil avoided: “All other precepts of the natural law are based upon this: so that whatever the practical reason naturally apprehends as man's good (or evil) belongs to the precepts of the natural law as something to be done or avoided” (q94a2). And what do we naturally apprehend as good? Those things toward which we are naturally inclined, for good is an end and these are our ends by nature. Aquinas identifies three levels of these inclinations: That common to all substances (the inclination to continue to exist), that shared with other animals (inclinations to reproduce and to educate one’s offspring), and that proper to rational beings (to know the truth, ultimately about God, and to live in society). Phrases such as “and so forth” and “and other such things” occur in this passage, indicating that this is a quick overview rather than an exhaustive statement of the content of the natural law.

How are these inclinations articulated into precepts? This question might take the form of a procedural question concerning how we might move from an inclination to a norm (a version of the concern about moving from is to ought); this is addressed above (the inclinations are directives given by eternal reason—the natural law is a participation in the eternal law in the sense that our natural inclinations have their origin in God’s plan and creative action (q91a2)). But it might also take the substantive form of asking how we move from the inclinations mentioned to particular norms, and this needs to be explained. As we saw, Aquinas holds that as soon as we understand the meaning of the terms “good” and “evil,” we naturally understand that good is to be done and pursued and evil avoided—we have this knowledge by a “natural habit” he calls synderesis, (see q94a1ad2 and Iaq79a12). We know other things in this way too: That we are to fulfill our special obligations to others, and to do evil to no one—these are elucidations of the first principle, and from them flow a number of other principles, which have also been revealed to us in the Decalogue (see Ia-IIaeq100): The command to honor one’s parents functions as a paradigm for honoring one’s indebtedness in general; the commands forbidding murder, adultery, and theft speak to refraining from doing evil to others by deed; the commands forbidding false witness and coveting speak to refraining from doing evil by word or thought.

Aquinas is not as explicit as we might wish about how we acquire this knowledge, and there is some dispute here among commentators. One question is, must we acquire it at all? Does not Aquinas say that the principles grasped by synderesis are self-evident (if that is a good translation of per se nota)? The answer is that, yes, we must acquire it, for there is no innate knowledge; synderesis is a habit and so must be acquired. We do acquire it naturally, in this sense, that once we come to understand the terms employed in the principles, the principles are naturally known to be true. Experience and reflection are needed to grasp the meaning of such terms as good and evil, the proper objects of special obligations, the scope of non-maleficence. In this process our natural inclinations play a role: life, family, social life, and knowledge are good for each, and our social nature further directs us to attend to the common good and the good of our neighbor as well as our own private good. We might sketch the process as follows (although Aquinas never puts it quite this way): Good is to be done and evil avoided. So first, since good is to be done, and special obligations indicate goods owed to others, they are to be fulfilled. Second, since evil is to be avoided, it is to be done to no one (our social inclination here coming into play); we are naturally inclined to life, family, and society, so obtaining these things is good for each and losing them evil; thus murder, adultery, and so forth are evil and so not to be done.

In any event, once we have such principles in hand, as Aquinas takes it we all do, we have also in hand a way of evaluating whether we should allow our simple willings (such as, “how nice a Roman holiday would be”) to pass into intention—would it be good or evil to go now to Rome—is it consistent or otherwise with my flourishing as a rational creature? Would it for example violate any special obligation I am under, or perhaps require stealing? As said above, any proximate end an agent is considering whether to adopt may also be seen as a means to the agent’s final end, and its suitability as such may be judged by its accord with precepts of the natural law—these should serve, we may say, as penultimate major premises, under the first principle of practical reason, of any practical syllogism (or, when stated negatively, as a “filter” for all prospective means or proximate ends).

There is one major piece of the puzzle we have yet to deal with, the role of virtue in all of this. First, how exactly do these three, blessedness, law, and virtue, fit together? As indicated above, the natural law is a participation in the eternal law that resides primarily in our natural inclinations: the rational creature “has a share of the Eternal Reason, whereby it has a natural inclination to its proper act and end: and this participation of the eternal law in the rational creature is called the natural law” (q91a2). Our natural inclinations direct us toward our proper end, that is to say toward beatitudo, and the attainment of it is the fulfillment of our inclinations. But as we have also seen, our blessedness consists in virtuous activity (culminating in the loving contemplation of God). Such being the case, we should expect the natural law to direct us toward virtuous activity, and Aquinas does say explicitly that the natural law prescribes virtuous activity (q94a3, and see Pinckaers for an interesting development of the idea that the natural inclinations are the “seeds of the virtues,” into which they grow through the work of reason and habituation). So natural law, through informing our natural inclinations, provides the direction toward our final end, through the virtues as (constitutive) means to it.

Second, how does virtue play this role? We move toward our end through free, reasoned action, and cannot simply decide to grasp our final end. We must make a series of choices and carry them out, and it is here that virtue plays its principal role. One thing we clearly must do is reason well about how to act; we require excellence in practical reasoning. And that is to say we require prudence, which just is the virtue that applies right reason to action. But we also require the moral virtues such as justice and fortitude, which enable our knowledge of both the ends and means in practical reasoning. Aquinas is clear, as Aristotle was not, that we naturally know the ends we should pursue (this is the role of synderesis; see above, and also IIa-IIaeq47a6), but he also insists that we are rightly disposed toward that end by the moral virtues (Ia-IIaeq65a1)—the moral virtues safeguard us from “forgetting” our ends under the influence of vice, custom, or passion (q94a6)—fortitude, for instance, helps us control our fear of dangers so as to remain committed to the common good. The virtues also enable us to find the right means to the end. This is properly the work of prudence. Looking at how prudence does this work will clarify how the moral virtues play a supporting role in it. Aquinas says prudence has eight “quasi-integral parts” which can be classified as follows: Those that supply knowledge (memory and understanding or an intuitive grasp of the salient features of the present situation), those that acquire knowledge (docility and shrewdness), that which uses knowledge (reasoning, constructing the practical syllogism), and those that apply knowledge in command, the chief act of prudence (foresight directs present actions to the foreseen end, circumspection adjusts means to circumstances, and caution avoids obstacles to realizing the end). Prudence depends on the moral virtues not just to safeguard reason’s grasp of principles, but throughout its reasoning toward action. The parts of prudence just enumerated should make this clear: Docility, for example, requires humility. Also, the identification of the correct means to an intended end involves the understanding, or intuitive grasp, of the situation that helps supply the minor premise in a practical syllogism (see IIa-IIaeq49a2ad1). But this understanding can be corrupted by the intrusion of passion, as in cases of incontinence (Ia-IIaeq77a2), a state to which all are subject, unless fortified by the moral virtues (Fifi’s hopping impatiently on the bus although a cab would have been better presents a very mild case of such incontinence).

d.  Final Comments

So for Aquinas practical reason is our capacity to discover how to move from our present situation toward the attainment of our final end. In successful practical reasoning, synderesis, prudence, and moral virtue work together to ensure that the action meets all of the criteria of a good action (q18aa1-4): suitability of object (what kind of action is this, borrowing or stealing?), due attention to circumstances (might frankness here and now be unduly embarrassing to one’s interlocutor?), and goodness of the end of action (is my goal in giving alms to impress a potential benefactor, or to succor the need of the less fortunate; ultimately, the end is good if and only if it is conducive to the agent’s final end). While practical reasoning presupposes our understanding of our final end as perfection, everything else in our practical lives, including our conception of our final end and to what extent we honor the principles grasped by synderesis, lies within its scope. When practical reasoning is done well leading to good action, the agent at one and the same time pursues her own perfection (the Aristotelian moment) and obeys the eternal law of God (the Augustinian)—the etymological connection between prudence and providence mirrors a metaphysical connection, for our practical reason participates in the eternal reason (q91a2; see also q19a10). Since our perfection is perfection as creatures, there is no tension between it and obedience—for Aquinas, practical reason is not torn between the fulfillment of obligation and the fulfillment of the agent.

3.  Voluntarist Theory: Scotus

The reception of Aristotle and other non-Christian thinkers was never entirely easy, and worries about the influence of Greek and Arabic thought culminated, just after Aquinas’s death, in the Condemnations of 1277. In publishing them, the Bishop of Paris condemned 219 propositions drawn chiefly from Aristotle and his commentators, and while the principal target of these condemnations was the teaching of a “radical Aristotelianism” (or “Latin Averroism”) contrary to the Catholic faith by masters on the Faculty of Arts such as Siger of Brabant, a number of the condemned propositions were drawn from Aquinas’s work, although Aquinas was not named. In their wake the marriage between Greek and Biblical thought, between Aristotle and Augustine we might say, is a stormier one. Among the chief concerns of the Condemnations were divine and human freedom, and later thinkers were especially concerned to safeguard both. Many of them, rejecting Aquinas’s account of human freedom, found it necessary to portray the will itself as free. One way they did this was to stress the will’s independence from determination by nature, including the natural power of the intellect and the second nature imparted by virtues. The will was seen as free rather than as natural, and as nobler than the intellect—thus these thinkers are often called voluntarists.

John Duns Scotus (c. 1266-1308) is the most impressive and influential of the post-1277 thinkers, and his sharp break with eudaimonism in many ways anticipates modern moral theory, especially that of Kant. It should be noted, though, that even in making this break Scotus is working within the medieval tradition, drawing here especially on St. Anselm’s work On the Fall of the Devil;   Scotus is also indebted to his Franciscan predecessors and fellow-travelers such as Henry of Ghent. The following presents some of the main lines of his account of practical reason, but readers should be aware that there are currently some major disputes over how to interpret Scotus; some of these will be mentioned, but readers are invited to consult the secondary sources mentioned for further information.

a.  Freedom of the Will

Scotus emphasizes the freedom of the will in three key ways. The first two are rooted in his (characteristically voluntarist) teaching that the will is a self-mover rather than moved by anything else (an active rather than passive power); the third helps explain this capacity for self-movement. The first, then, lies in his emphasis on the dominance of the will over other powers, including the intellect. Just as in seeing we can focus on an object not in the center of our visual field, so in intellection the will can focus on and enjoy something other than what the intellect directly presents, and thus redirect the intellect (Opus Oxoniense II, dist. 42, qq1-4, nn. 10-11). The moral importance of this is that the will can turn aside from what the intellect presents as good and pursue something else (although   that something else must be good in some respect). Second, he insists that in addition to being able to will or “nil” (velle or nolle), the will always retains the option simply to refrain from willing (non velle). This is important, for Scotus takes it that if we necessarily will something, we are not free. Scotus allows that the will is unable to nil beatitude, but holds that it can refrain from willing it, and so remains free (Ordinatio IV, suppl., dist. 49, qq9-10). This points up an important difference between his account and that of an intellectualist like Aquinas, who maintains that when the intellect has perfect vision of a perfect good (as it does only in the beatific vision), the intellect sees it as good, and the will adheres to that good, both from natural necessity. Scotus denies the necessity of willing the good presented by the intellect even here. The third point concerns his adoption of Anselm’s notion of the two affections of the will (which itself draws on Augustine’s account of the two loves of the will). The will’s tendency toward the agent’s perfection is called the affectio commodi, the natural appetite of the will that prohibits us from nilling perfection. It is similar to the will, simply, as it is understood by eudaimonist thinkers like Aquinas. See (Williams 1995) for an argument that it is identical to the will so understood; see (Toner 2005) for an argument that it is not. But it does not exhaust the will for Scotus, nor does it necessitate the willing of happiness, due to the affectio iustitiae, the tendency of the will to love things in accordance with their goodness, and not simply as means to or constituents of our own happiness. It is this affection, for Scotus, that grants the will its “native liberty.”

It also renders his account of practical reason more complicated, for now we see two distinct ways in which reason can present something as good to the will: First, something may be judged to be conducive to our happiness or perfection as rational agents (attracting the affectio commodi); second, something may be judged to be morally good or right or just (appealing to the affectio iustitiae). Thus, we can reason about how to attain happiness, or how to act justly. And although these will come together in our final union with God, they are always formally distinct and will often pull apart in this life. There is a hint here of what Sidgwick would much later call a dualism of practical reason, a dualism which in various forms characterizes most modern moral systems, Kantian or utilitarian.  Scotus’ response to this situation also anticipates modern moral thinking (see Toner on this)—the pursuit of happiness must be moderated by justice; as Scotus puts it, the affection for justice acts as a “checkrein” (moderatrix) on the affection for happiness (Ordinatio II, dist. 6, q2). If the pursuit is not so moderated, it will be bad or at best morally indifferent. A crucial, and characteristically voluntarist, implication follows: Once the intellect has judged an act to be good (in either broad sense), the will remains free to follow the judgment or not, according to which affection it acts on. It may refuse to pursue a good conducive to happiness because doing so conflicts with a requirement of justice; it may turn from a good required by justice in order to pursue happiness instead (in the Ordinatio passage just cited, Scotus accounts for the sin of the angels along these lines). For better or worse, depending upon what one takes freedom to involve, Aquinas’s moderately intellectualist view that reason and will concur in free choice has been replaced by the voluntarist view that once reason has done its work, the will must independently make its free choice.

Here we touch on a controversial area. None of the voluntarists held that reason could be dispensed with, or was unimportant. At the least, reason must present options (and recommendations) to the will for it to be able to choose. Henry of Ghent had maintained that this was the extent of reason’s contribution to free choice (that it was merely a causa sine qua non—a necessary pre-condition of willing, but not properly a cause of it). Scotus at one point held a more moderate view, that reason served as a partial efficient cause of willing. Some Scotus scholars argue that he later moved further in the voluntarist direction, coming to accept something close to Henry’s view (or at least acknowledging it as an account just as persuasive as his own earlier view; see (Dumont 2001) for a detailed discussion). Whatever the correct view of  Scotus’ mature position, however, the point about the will’s independence from reason should not be taken to be a denial of reason’s important role leading up to choice.

It would be an even greater mistake to think that, because Scotus is a voluntarist, he downplays reason’s contribution to choosing morally good actions. In fact, Scotus insists as firmly as Aquinas that to be morally good, an action must be willed in accordance with right reason (Quodlibet, q18). What does this involve for Scotus?

b.  Synderesis, Conscience, and the Natural Law

Scotus follows tradition in invoking the notions of synderesis and conscience (Ordinatio II, dist. 39): Conscience is the habit of drawing the right conclusions about what is to be done by means of the practical syllogism. As such it depends upon knowledge of the first principles of practical reason, and synderesis is the habit of knowing these. What are they? Like Aquinas, Scotus takes them to be precepts of the natural law, but his handling of these precepts is quite different. His treatment of natural law makes no reference to natural inclinations—instead of being articulations of the directedness of human nature, the precepts are rules that are self-evident to reason because their denials lead to contradictions. For example, since good is the object of love and God is infinite goodness itself, the first principle of practical reason is that God is to be loved or, most strictly, God is not to be hated (Ordinatio III, suppl., dist. 37), for “goodness itself is to be hated” is self-contradictory. Scotus also relates the natural law to the Decalogue, and holds that from this first principle we may conclude that the precepts of the First Table (relating to God) follow and belong to the natural law strictly speaking. The precepts of the Second Table (relating to neighbor), however, belong to the natural law only broadly speaking—they are consonant with the principles known to be true analytically, but do not follow from them necessarily. In this passage, Scotus also distinguishes the precepts of the First and Second Tables, the precepts that belong to the natural law strictly and only broadly speaking, as follows: It is, in the abstract, possible for us to attain our final end of loving God without following the precepts of the Second Table (although not in the concrete, given that God actually has issued these commands), but is absolutely impossible for us to attain it while disobeying the precepts of the First. Thus, practical reason by itself is sufficient to tell us that if God exists, we must not hate Him, must have no other gods before Him. Scotus does not think we are left with theoretical possibilities and unaided practical reason—we know from Revelation that God has ordained the precepts of the Second Table, which are thus binding (for having been commanded, they move beyond being merely consonant with the love of God). Still, strictly speaking they are contingent and could be set aside or altered by God’s absolute power. Indeed Scotus thinks that in certain cases God has actually dispensed from them (see Ordinatio III, suppl., dist. 37; there is dispute among scholars as to how malleable the content of moral principles concerning love of neighbor is, and how open to rational investigation; see for example Wolter, Williams 1995, and Mohle’s contribution to Williams 2003).

To illustrate the relationship of consonance, Scotus gives us an example of the analogous relationship in positive law between “the principle of positive law,” that life in community should be peaceful, and secondary legal principles concerning private property. The institution of private property is not absolutely required to preserve peace, but given the infirmities of human nature, the common holding of property is likely to result in dispute and neglect. Thus allowing people to have their own possessions is “exceedingly consonant with peaceful living.” Likewise, although failing to love one’s neighbor is not strictly inconsistent with loving God (nor rejecting precepts stated in the Second Table strictly inconsistent with loving one’s neighbor), there is a harmony or consonance at both points (between love of God and neighbor, and between love of neighbor and honoring these precepts), for God has created us as social creatures and the precepts of the Second Table are conducive to social life. Although Scotus is not explicit, we may surmise that the principle that life in community ought to be peaceful belongs to the natural law in this broad sense, as peaceful life with God’s other rational creatures seems “exceedingly consonant” with love of God. As we will see, Scotus does explicitly say elsewhere that the “Silver Rule” belongs to the law of nature (broadly speaking). Prohibitions against murder, adultery, false witness and so forth follow from these pretty clearly, by way of consonance if not strict logical necessity.

So right practical reason begins from the precepts of the natural law, but how does it move to the judgment of conscience? Let us look at a case of deciding what to say when asked about one’s role in a certain affair, perhaps when lying might keep the agent out of some trouble. Scotus takes it that reason can grasp the wrongness of lying on the following basis: The Silver Rule, “Do not do to others what you would not want them to do to you,” is not only a commandment but a law of nature, at least in the broad sense; no one would want to be deceived by his neighbor; therefore, …. (Ordinatio III, suppl., dist. 38). With this principle in hand, how is one to act? It will depend on the particulars of the situation. The agent should now know that he should not deceive, but should tell the truth (or perhaps remain silent, if, say, the person asking is a gossip with no real stake in the matter; let us assume such is not the case). This much is clear from reason’s grasp of the principle and its understanding of the agent himself as a rational being, the action as speaking to another rational being, and the object as telling the truth (Scotus gives an example with the agent under the description of (rational) animal, the action as eating, and the object as nourishing food; Quodlibet, q18). But practical reason still has work to do: It must discern the right manner in which to tell the truth (say, calmly and straightforwardly rather than aggressively or evasively), and the right time and place (later in private, rather than now in company, say). Most importantly, it must place the act in service of a “worthy purpose,” direct it to an appropriate end (one that is just rather than merely advantageous—for acts that proceed solely from the affectio commodi will not be fully in accordance with right reason, since they focus only on the value of their objects to the agent, ignoring what intrinsic value they may have—thus Scotus holds that they are at best morally indifferent).

c.  The Non-Teleological Character of Scotus’ Thought

Much of the detail above is similar to what Aquinas says about the moral goodness of action, which should not be surprising because both are drawing on Aristotle and Christian tradition, but there is an important difference as to the goodness of the ends of particular actions. Aquinas takes it that in intending, the will (and its proximate ends) should be ordered to the final end or highest good. This final end is the perfection of the agent, which itself consists in the right relation to God. In principle, the agent could articulate this ordering as a series of syllogisms in which practical reason clarified the way the pursuit of this proximate end is linked to the pursuit of the agent’s final end as set by her nature as a rational creature. A metaphorical way of putting this: Actions can be seen as episodes in a story that the agent, by means of her practical reason, is writing (or co-authoring, given God’s providential role). In the well-written story (the practically rational life blessed by grace), the episodes successfully lead up to the happy ending, in which the agent is united with her true love and, quite literally, lives happily ever after.

For Scotus, this teleological character largely (though not entirely) disappears. Actions must still be related to God, whom Scotus is happy to refer to as our final end. But now God in a way serves less as final end than as first cause, in the sense of author of the moral law or of dispensations from it; God is not so much sought after as an end, as honored and obeyed as source. At least in those actions that have creatures as their object (that is, most actions we perform in this life)—and which are therefore only contingently related to our attainment of God as our final end—practical reason does not identify the right way to act by discerning how the prospective actions contribute to a series leading up to the right relation to God (it does not construct a series of syllogisms in the way just mentioned). Instead, each prospective action is judged separately, as to whether it honors God appropriately, expresses love of God and obeys His commands (although such thoughts need not be always present in the agent’s mind). Actions may still be teleologically ordered, for a number of actions may be ordered to the accomplishment of a moral end. But it is no longer the case that all actions and their ends must be organized into a pattern or narrative completed only in the agent’s attainment of her final end, and that they can be fully assessed only in light of their place in such a pattern. Instead, each action (or course of action) stands alone as a complete work, and the ends of actions may be judged in light of their fit with the situation and their accord or discord with precepts of the natural law or other authoritative source (revealed commands, a divine dispensation). Picking up the author metaphor again, life is not so much a novel as a collection of epigrams and short stories, dedicated with love to God. This deep difference between Aquinas and Scotus is reflected in—indeed is a consequence of—their different formulations of the first principle of practical reason: “Good is to be done and pursued, and evil avoided” (Aquinas); “God is to be loved, and never hated” (Scotus). The one focuses on pursuit of the good (relationship with God); the other on the expression of love for God.

Related to this is  Scotus’ reduced role for the moral virtues: He holds that prudence can exist without moral virtue, that as free we always have what we need to do the right action here and now; it need not be part of a larger pattern involving the development of character (Ordinatio III, suppl., dist. 36). Yet, Scotus has no wish to deny that the virtues are important: they can help turn the will from evil (the willing of which can blind the intellect to the truth by turning it away for a time), can help facilitate the will’s choosing in accordance with the right judgment of prudence, and can also help the act to be done in the right manner. Moral virtue assists us, then, both in reasoning about action and in making that reasoning effectively practical, but it is not essential to performing morally good actions.

d.  Note on Ockham

Now it is perhaps these non-teleological aspects of  Scotus’ thought, more than any other, that mark him out as a transitional figure. It is thus worth noting that it is concerning this feature of his thought that some of the disputes mentioned above are taking place. Williams (1995) and MacIntyre (1990) stress the role of obligation and divine commands in his theory; Hare and Ingham stress instead the role of love and the goal of relationship with God—views perhaps susceptible of some kind of teleological interpretation after all. However in the end Scotus should be read on this, it does seem fair to say, at the least, that divine commands, and the related notions of obligation and obedience, play a more prominent role in his thinking than they do in that of Aquinas.

And in any event, the later Franciscan William of Ockham will leave little doubt that he is a divine command theorist (but, see Osborne and the noted selections in Spade for a recent exchange on this). This does not mean that he is not concerned with practical reason; he still insists that the morally good action is the one dictated by right reason and willed because so dictated (Quodlibet IIIq15). But practical reason now operates within the framework of God’s ordained power, wholly constructed by God’s sovereign will. Knowledge of what God’s power has actually ordained, and thus of how we should act, is now even more dependent upon revelation; God could, by his absolute power, command us even to hate him, and it would then be right for us to do so. Here we have moved from  Scotus’ moderate voluntarism to an extreme form in which morality consists in the obligation impressed by the commanding divine will upon the obedient (or otherwise) human will, and in which practical reason serves merely to help articulate what has been commanded and how to carry it out. The prevailing order, for Ockham, is one in which familiar concepts have application (prudence, the moral virtues, the Decalogue), but the radical contingency hanging about the whole is novel.

4.  Medieval and Modern

This section briefly examines the influence of these two theorists on contemporary practical reasoning theory, and also explores the relation between their views of practical reason and some common positions in current debates (those between Generalists and Particularists, and between Internalists and Externalists).

a.  The Current Influence of Aquinas and Scotus

The two figures focused on above are the two who seem most relevant to contemporary theorizing about practical reason. Aquinas’s influence is widespread: In Anglophonic moral philosophy Alasdair MacIntyre is perhaps the best-known among his many followers, developing Aquinas’s thought in ways more sensitive to the context of culture and tradition. Candace Vogler develops a broadly Thomistic theory of practical reason, exploring both his account of the capital vices and his division of the good into befitting, pleasurable, and useful (See (Toner 2005) for a short look at this division, and (Vogler 2002) for a very thorough treatment), concluding that in an atheistic context, it will be reasonable for some agents to be vicious. In general, the relevance of Aquinas’s thought as a development of Aristotle makes him a likely source for anyone working on practical reasoning or moral theory in this tradition, a fact not missed by some prominent moral theorists, most notably Philippa Foot and Rosalind Hursthouse. As for Scotus, his affinity with, and likely indirect influence upon, Kant, has been remarked by friends and foes alike (Williams and MacIntyre, for example). His direct influence on current thinking has not been great, but if the continuing progress on the critical edition of his works and the proliferation of Scotus scholarship are any indication, this may be beginning to change. In mainstream English philosophy, John Hare is perhaps the most prominent theorist so far to develop positions deeply indebted to Scotus.  Scotus’ combination within his moral theory of deontological and virtue elements should make his thinking of interest to Kantian or other deontological theorists intent on appropriating broadly Aristotelian notions of virtue. Also, his subtle treatment of the relations between reason, divine and human freedom, and the absolute and ordained powers of God, should make him of great interest to contemporary divine command theorists (Hare provides one example of this).

b. The Medievals and Particularism

Turning to the first of the current debates concerning practical reason: Let generalism be the view that the presence of some features of action (say that it causes pleasure, or is unkind) always tends to make the action right (or wrong)—such features have invariable “deontic valence.” This may come in forms “thin” (some natural features of action, say conduciveness to pleasure, always have a positive valence) or “thick” (while there are no such natural features, there are certain thick features, like kindness or fairness or spitefulness, that have invariable valence). Particularism, then, is the denial of this. We may speak of thin or thick forms particularism, being denials of the corresponding forms of generalism (one may, then, be at the same time a thick generalist and thin particularist). Where do the medievals fall along this spectrum? They tend toward thick generalism, indeed, we might say toward thick absolutism, a form of generalism maintaining that there are some features of action that not only tend to make an action right or wrong, but always succeed in doing so. For Aquinas, for example, the fact that any action was vicious, or violated any precept of the natural law, would make it wrong. This is thick rather than thin generalism because the precepts have evaluative content that cannot be reduced to merely “natural” or thin terms (for example, while the precept against murder is certainly not just the claim that “wrongful killing is wrong,” it is the claim that “intentional killing of the innocent is wrong,” and “innocence” cannot be reduced to thin, non-evaluative language). For Scotus, things look quite similar, within the framework of God’s ordained power. But because dispensations are possible by God’s absolute power, the features picked out by natural law precepts relevant to the Second Table are not of invariable valence (that Isaac was innocent may actually tend to make sacrificing him right, given God’s command to Abraham). Still, there are some absolutes for Scotus, those pertaining to the love of God in the First Table. Ockham comes the closest to particularism, leaving just one feature of actions that has invariably positive valence, its having been commanded by God. Ockham also maintains that, when possible, loving God above all things is always right, subtly reconciling this with his claim that God could command us not to love Him (on the grounds that given such a command it would be impossible to love Him above all things; see Quodlibet IIIq14).

c. The Medievals and Internalism

Let us turn to reasons for action and their connection to motivation. Internalism comes in many forms, but common to them is the claim that if an agent has a reason to do some action A, she also has a motive to A (the denial of this—the assertion that an agent may have a reason to A but have no motive to A—is called “externalism”). One characteristic form of internalism, often referred to as “Humean,” is the claim that if R is a reason for S to do A, then A must serve some desire that S actually has. The medievals were not internalists in this sense. A Thomistic agent, for example, has a reason to pursue a good perfective of him even if he has no desire for it at present. But, does not the agent have another desire the good serves, namely for perfection? Actually no. It is the will that naturally aims at what is perfective of the agent, and the will is a power, not a standing desire. But the will is naturally inclined to pursue such goods, so perhaps a modified internalism, that cited not just actual but also counterfactual desires (the agent would desire it if suitably informed and so forth)? Perhaps so, but details aside, there is one more critical qualification to make: Although internalism strictly requires only a connection between reason and motivation, it is usually also held that the latter has priority, that the explanatory direction is from desire to reason for action. For Aquinas, the direction is instead from reason to desire (the various acts of reason serving as the formal causes of the corresponding acts of will). Allowing for this, and given careful specifications of the counterfactual conditions, Aquinas and other intellectualists could probably be brought under some fold or other of the big tent of internalism.

For Scotus and other (sometimes more thoroughgoing) voluntarists, things are harder to see. The relation between intellect and will is looser, but still it is not held that the will’s desiring something can create a reason for the agent to act; instead, reason serves as a sort of necessary condition of the will’s act of desire (as mentioned above, perhaps a partial efficient cause as Scotus held at one point, perhaps as a causa sine qua non as Henry of Ghent held and—some argue—Scotus later held). If the will is the total cause of its own willing, or at least the primary cause, it can refrain from willing in accordance with the judgment presented by right practical reason (recall  Scotus’ point about non velle). Scotus even, following Anselm, performs a thought experiment concerning an angel created without the affectio iustitiae, maintaining that it could then only pursue its own happiness, and not what is intrinsically just. He does not explicitly say that it correctly identifies the right reasons for action, but given the independence of prudence from the moral virtues, it seems likely it could (“God is not to be hated” is, after all, supposed to be self-evidently true; and such an angel could understand the content of God’s revealed commands). If so, it could have reasons (not to hate God, not to commit or encourage lying or murder) with no corresponding desires (since it lacks the affectio iustitiae that would motivate it to follow these precepts even in cases in which doing so is not instrumental to its own happiness).

It is dangerous to sort philosophers according to distinctions they themselves do not have in mind (notice my hesitant language about Aquinas’s internalism above), but it seems that Scotus and other voluntarists would likely be externalists. This can be said more confidently—neither intellectualist nor voluntarist agents look much like the internalist and externalist agents one typically meets in the contemporary literature. But perhaps this is an advantage, for the medievals develop options largely ignored in much current discussion. And, it may be that the presence of more angels—falling, deformed, whole, and standing firm—would make for much livelier discussion.

5. Conclusion: Common Themes among the Medievals

So far this article has emphasized differences between the medieval accounts of practical reason, and their connections with some points in current theorizing. It is worth bringing out a few features that bring the medievals together while distinguishing them as a group from most current theorists. First, there is the shared Aristotelian and Augustinian heritage, already mentioned above. With this comes an agreement that our final end is the right relationship with God, a union with God by means of intellect and will. This is perfectly clear in intellectualists like Aquinas, but also holds for voluntarists. Scotus, for example, agrees that God is our final end; the initially open question is how to relate to Him: qua object of the affectio commodi (as the source of our perfection), or qua object of the affectio iustitiae (as perfect in Himself). And for all of the medievals, the good life consists in the successful attempt to achieve this union, to find, we might say, one’s proper place in Creation. In The City of God XIX.13, Augustine defines peace—our final end on his account—as the tranquillity of order, where order is the arrangement of things in which each finds its proper place in relation to the others, under God.

None of this is intended to paper over important differences, for example about just how to characterize that proper place, or whether the attempt to find it is best seen as a unified narrative or as a set of independent courses of action (whether life is a novel, we might say, or an anthology of short stories). It is intended only to stress the broad and important agreement underlying the differences in their accounts of practical reason. This is an agreement we should not find surprising given their shared belief, based on both philosophical argument and on faith, in a providential Creator, who is both Reason and Goodness. And it is an agreement whose importance we can recognize when we note that no medieval ever held that right practical reason could recommend an immoral course of action as, if Vogler is right, it can often do in an atheistic context.

6. References and Further Reason

a. Primary Sources

  • Anselm, On the Fall of the Devil, translated by Ralph McInerny in Anselm of Canterbury: The Major Works, edited by Brian Davies and Gillian Evans (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1998).
  • Aristotle, The Nicomachean Ethics, translated by Terence Irwin (Indianapolis: Hackett Press, second edition 1999).
  • Aristotle, On the Soul, translated by J.A. Smith in The Complete Works of Aristotle, volume 1, edited by Jonathan Barnes (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1984).
  • Aristotle, Metaphysics, translated by W.D. Ross in The Complete Works of Aristotle, volume 1, edited by Jonathan Barnes (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1984).
  • Augustine, On Free Choice of the Will, translated by Thomas Williams (Indianapolis: Hackett Press, 1993).
  • Augustine, Confessions, translated by R.S. Pine-Coffin (London: Penguin Classics, 1961).
  • Augustine, The City of God against the Pagans, translated by R.W. Dyson (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1998).
  • Henry of Ghent, Quodlibetal Questions on Free Will, translated by Roland Teske (Milwaukee: Marquette University Press, 1993).
  • Ockham (Occam), William of. Quodlibetal Questions, translated by Alfred Freddoso and Francis Kelley (New Haven: Yale University Press, 1998).
  • Scotus, John Duns. Duns Scotus on the Will and Morality, selections made and translated by Allan Wolter (Washington: The Catholic University of America Press, 1997).
    • Many of  Scotus’ writings are divided in much the way described below for Aquinas. One further subdivision often included in works commenting on Peter Lombard’s Sentences (such as  Scotus’ Ordinatio), the distinctio, is noted as “dist.”
  • Thomas Aquinas, Summa theologiae, translated by the Fathers of the English Dominican Province (Allen, TX: Christian Classics, 1981).
    • This work is divided into three parts, with the second itself sub-divided into two parts. The parts are further broken up into questions, and the questions into articles. The articles themselves comprise objections to the position Aquinas will take, a claim “to the contrary,” Aquinas’s argument for his position, and replies to the objections. Parts are customarily referred to as follows: Ia, IIa, IIIa (from the Latin prima, secunda, and tertia); the parts of the second part as Ia-IIae and IIa-IIae (from prima secundae and secunda secundae—first of the second, second of the second). Questions are denoted simply by “q,” articles by “a,” and replies to objections by “ad” or toward. If not otherwise noted, the reference is to the body of the article or corpus (“c”), Aquinas’s argument for his position. So for instance, Ia-IIaeq13a1ad3 refers to the first part of the second part, question 13, article 1, reply to the third objection.
  • Thomas Aquinas, Commentary on Aristotle’s Nicomachean Ethics, translated by C.I. Litzinger (Notre Dame: Dumb Ox Books, 1993).

b. Secondary Sources

  • Bradley, Denis. Aquinas on the Twofold Human Good (Washington: The Catholic University of America Press, 1997).
  • Cross, Richard. Duns Scotus (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1999).
  • Dahl, Norman. Practical Reason, Aristotle, and Weakness of the Will (Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1984).
  • Dumont, Stephen. “Did Duns Scotus Change His Mind on the Will?” in Nach der Verurteilung von 1277, edited by Jan Aersten, Kent Emery, and Andreas Speer (Berlin: Walter de Gruyter, 2001), 719-794.
  • Eardley, P.S. “Thomas Aquinas and Giles of Rome on the Will,” The Review of Metaphysics 56 (2003): 835-862.
  • Gallagher, David. “Thomas Aquinas on the Will as Rational Appetite,” Journal of the History of Philosophy 29 (1991), 559-584.
  • Hall, Pamela. Narrative and the Natural Law: An Interpretation of Thomistic Ethics (Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press, 1994).
  • Hare, John. “Scotus on Morality and Nature,” Medieval Philosophy and Theology 9 (2000), 15-38.
  • Hare, John. God’s Call (Grand Rapids: Eerdman’s, 2000).
  • Ingham, Mary Beth. “Duns Scotus, Morality and Happiness: A Reply to Thomas Williams,” American Catholic Philosophical Quarterly 74 (2000), 173-195.
  • Ingham, Mary Beth and Mechthild Dreyer. The Philosophical Vision of John Duns Scotus (Washington: The Catholic University of America Press, 2004).
  • Kent, Bonnie. Virtues of the Will (Washington: The Catholic University of America Press, 1995).
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. Whose Justice? Which Rationality? (Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press, 1988).
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. Three Rival Versions of Moral Enquiry (Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press, 1990).
  • MacDonald, Scott. “Ultimate Ends in Practical Reasoning: Aquinas’s Aristotelian Moral Psychology and Anscombe’s Fallacy,” The Philosophical Review 100 (1991): 31-65.
  • MacDonald, Scott and Eleonore Stump. (editors), Aquinas’s Moral Theory: Essays in Honor of Norman Kretzmann (Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1999).
  • McCluskey, Colleen. “Worthy Constraints in Albertus Magnus’s Theory of Action,” Journal of the History of Philosophy 39 (2001): 491-533.
  • McCluskey, Colleen. “Medieval Theories of Free Will,” Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
  • McInerny, Ralph. Aquinas on Human Action (Washington: The Catholic University of America Press, 1992).
  • Osborne, Thomas. “Ockham as a Divine-Command Theorist,” Religious Studies 41 (2005): 1-22.
  • Pinckaers, Servais. The Sources of Christian Ethics, translated by Sister Mary Thomas Noble (Washington: The Catholic University of America Press, 1995).
  • Porter, Jean. Nature as Reason: A Thomistic Theory of the Natural Law (Grand Rapids: Eerdmans, 2005).
  • Rist, John. Augustine: Ancient Thought Baptized (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996).
  • Spade, Paul Vincent. (editor), The Cambridge Companion to Ockham (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1999).
    • See especially the essays by King and McCord Adams.
  • Toner, Christopher. “Angelic Sin in Aquinas and Scotus and the Genesis of Some Central Objections to Contemporary Virtue Ethics,” The Thomist 69 (2005): 79-125.
  • Vogler, Candace. Reasonably Vicious (Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 2002).
  • Westberg, Daniel. Right Practical Reason (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1994).
  • Williams, Thomas. “How Scotus Separates Morality from Happiness,” American Catholic Philosophical Quarterly 69 (1995), 425-445.
  • Williams, Thomas. (editor), The Cambridge Companion to Duns Scotus (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2003).
    • See especially the essays by Mohle, Williams, and Kent.
  • Wolter, Allan. “Native Freedom of the Will as a Key to the Ethics of Scotus” in The Philosophical Theology of John Duns Scotus, edited by Marilyn McCord Adams (Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1990).

Author Information

Christopher Toner
University of St. Thomas
U. S. A.

Thomas Aquinas (1225—1274)


Saint Thomas Aquinas was a Catholic Priest in the Dominican Order and one of the most important Medieval philosophers and theologians. He was immensely influenced by scholasticism and Aristotle and known for his synthesis of the two aforementioned traditions. Although he wrote many works of philosophy and theology throughout his life, his most influential work is the Summa Theologica which consists of three parts.

The first part is on God. In it, he gives five proofs for God's existence as well as an explication of His attributes. He argues for the actuality and incorporeality of God as the unmoved mover and describes how God moves through His thinking and willing.

The second part is on Ethics. Thomas argues for a variation of the Aristotelian Virtue Ethics. However, unlike Aristotle, he argues for a connection between the virtuous man and God by explaining how the virtuous act is one towards the blessedness of the Beatific Vision (beata visio).

The last part of the Summa is on Christ and was unfinished when Thomas died. In it, he shows how Christ not only offers salvation, but represents and protects humanity on Earth and in Heaven. This part also briefly discusses the sacraments and eschatology. The Summa remains the most influential of Thomas’s works and is mostly what will be discussed in this overview of his philosophy.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Writings
    1. The Summa Part I: God
    2. The Summa Part II: Ethics
    3. The Summa Part III: Christ
  3. The Sacraments

1. Life

The birth-year of Thomas Aquinas is commonly given as 1227, but he was probably born early in 1225 at his father's castle of Roccasecea (75 m. e.s.e. of Rome) in Neapolitan territory. He died at the monastery of Fossanova, one mile from Sonnino (64 m. s.e. of Rome), Mar. 7, 1274. His father was Count Landulf of an old high-born south Italian family, and his mother was Countess Theodora of Theate, of noble Norman descent. In his fifth year he was sent for his early education to the monastery of Monte Cassino, where his father's brother Sinibald was abbot. Later he studied in Naples. By about 1243 he determined to enter the Dominican order; but on the way to Rome he was seized by his brothers and brought back to his parents at the castle of S. Giovanni, where he was held a captive for a year or two and besieged with prayers, threats, and even sensual temptation to make him relinquish his purpose. Finally the family yielded and the order sent Thomas to Cologne to study under Albertus Magnus, where he arrived probably toward the end of 1244. He accompanied Albertus to Paris in 1245, remained there with his teacher, continuing his studies for three years, and followed Albertus at the latter's return to Cologne in 1248. For several years longer he remained with the famous philosopher of scholasticism, presumably teaching. This long association of Thomas with the great polyhistor was the most important influence in his development; it made him a comprehensive scholar and won him permanently for the Aristotelian method. Around 1252 Thomas went to Paris for the master's degree, which he found some difficulty in attaining owing to attacks, at that time on the mendicant orders. Ultimately, however, he received the degree and entered ceremoniously upon his office of teaching in 1257; he taught in Paris for several years and there wrote certain of his works and began others. In 1259 he was present at an important chapter of his order at Valenciennes at the solicitation of Pope Urban IV. Therefore not before the latter part of 1261, he took up residence in Rome. In 1269-71 he was again active in Paris. In 1272 the provincial chapter at Florence empowered him to found a new studium generale at any place he should choose, and he selected Naples. Early in 1274 the pope directed him to attend the Council of Lyons and he undertook the journey, although he was far from well. On the way he stopped at the castle of a niece and became seriously ill. He wished to end his days in a monastery and not being able to reach a house of the Dominicans he was carried to the Cistercian Fossanova. There he died and his remains were preserved.

2. Writings

The writings of Thomas may be classified as: (1) exegetical, homiletical, and liturgical; (2) dogmatic, apologetic, and ethical; and (3) philosophical. Among the genuine works of the first class were: Commentaries on Job (1261-65); on Psalms, according to some a reportatum, or report of speeches furnished by his companion Raynaldus; on Isaiah; the Catena aurea, which is a running commentary on the four Gospels, constructed on numerous citations from the Fathers; probably a Commentary on Canticles, and on Jeremiah; and wholly or partly reportata, on John, on Matthew, and on the epistles of Paul; including, according to one authority, Hebrews i.-x. Thomas prepared for Urban IV: Officium de corpore Christi (1264); and the following works may be either genuine or reportataExpositio angelicce salutationisTractatus de decem praeceptisOrationis dominico expositio; Sermones pro dominicis diebus et pro sanctorum solemnitatibusSermones de angelisand Sermones de quadragesima. Of his sermons only manipulated copies are extant. In the second division were: In quatitor sententiarum libros, of his first Paris sojourn; Questiones disputatce, written at Paris and Rome; Questiones quodlibetales duodecini; Summa catholicce fidei contra gentiles (1261-C,4); andthe Summa theologica. To the dogmatic works belong also certain commentaries, as follows: Expositio in librum beati Dionysii de divinis nominibitsExpositiones primoe et secundce; In Boethii libros de hebdomadibus; and Proeclare quoestiones super librum Boethii de trinitate. A large number ofopuscitla also belonged to this group. Of philosophical writings there are cataloged thirteen commentaries on Aristotle, besides numerous philosophical opuscula of which fourteen are classed as genuine.

a. The Summa Part I: God

The greatest work of Thomas was the Summa, and it is the fullest presentation of his views. He worked on it from the time of Clement IV (after 1265) until the end of his life. When he died he had reached question ninety of part III, on the subject of penance. What was lacking was afterward added from the fourth book of his commentary on the "Sentences" of Peter Lombard as a supplementum, which is not found in manuscripts of the thirteenth and fourteenth centuries. The Summa consists of three parts. Part I treats of God, who is the "first cause, himself uncaused" (primum movens immobile) and as such existent only in act (actu), that is pure actuality without potentiality and, therefore, without corporeality. His essence is actus purus et perfectus. This follows from the fivefold proof for the existence of God; namely, there must be a first mover himself unmoved, a first cause in the chain of causes, an absolutely necessary being, an absolutely perfect being, and a rational designer. In this connection the thoughts of the unity, infinity, unchangeableness, and goodness of the highest being are deduced. The spiritual being of God is further defined as thinking and willing. His knowledge is absolutely perfect since he knows himself and all things as appointed by him. Since every knowing being strives after the thing known as end, will is implied in knowing. Inasmuch as God knows himself as the perfect good, he wills himself as end. But in that everything is willed by God, everything is brought by the divine will to himself in the relation of means to end. Therein God wills good to every being which exists, that is he loves it; and, therefore, love is the fundamental relation of God to the world. If the divine love be thought of simply as act of will, it exists for every creature in like measure: but if the good assured by love to the individual be thought of, it exists for different beings in various degrees. In so far as the loving God gives to every being what it needs in relation practical reason, affording the idea of the moral law of nature, so important in medieval ethics.

b. The Summa Part II: Ethics

The first part of the Summa is summed up in the thought that God governs the world as the universal first cause. God sways the intellect in that he gives the power to know aid impresses the species intelligibileson the mind; and he ways the will in that he holds the good before it as aim, and creates the virtus volendi. To will is nothing else than a certain inclination toward the object of the volition which is the universal good. God works all in all, but so that things also themselves exert their proper efficiency. Here the Areopagitic ideas of the graduated effects of created things play their part in Thomas's thought. The second part of the Summa (consisting of two parts, namely, prima secundae and secundae, secunda) follows this complex of ideas. Its theme is man's striving after the highest end, which is the blessedness of the visio beata. Here Thomas develops his system of ethics, which has its root in Aristotle. In a chain of acts of will man strives for the highest end. They are free acts in so far as man has in himself the knowledge of their end and therein the principle of action. In that the will wills the end, it wills also the appropriate means, chooses freely and completes the consensus. Whether the act be good or evil depends on the end. The "human reason" pronounces judgment concerning the character of the end, it is, therefore, the law for action. Human acts, however, are meritorious in so far as they promote the purpose of God and his honor. By repeating a good action man acquires a moral habit or a quality which enables him to do the good gladly and easily. This is true, however, only of the intellectual and moral virtues, which Thomas treats after the mariner of Aristotle; the theological virtues are imparted by God to man as a "disposition" from which the acts here proceed, but while they strengthen, they do not form it. The "disposition" of evil is the opposite alternative. An act becomes evil through deviation from the reason and the divine moral law. Therefore, sin involves two factors: its substance or matter is lust; in form, however, it is deviation from the divine law. Sin has its origin in the will, which decides, against the reason, for a changeable good. Since, however, the will also moves the other powers of man, sin has its seat in these too. By choosing such a lower good as end, the will is misled by self-love, so that this works as cause in every sin. God is not the cause of sin, since, on the contrary, he draws all things to himself. But from another side God is the cause of all things, so he is efficacious also in sin as *-ctio but not as ens. The devil is not directly the cause of sin, but he incites by working on the imagination and the sensuous impulse of man, as men or things may also do. Sin is original. Adam's first sin passes upon himself and all the succeeding race; because he is the head of the human race and "by virtue of procreation human nature is transmitted and along with nature its infection." The powers of generation are, therefore, designated especially as "infected."

In every work of God both justice and mercy are united, and his justice always presupposes his mercy since he owes no one anything and gives more bountifully than is due. As God rules in the world, the "plan of the order of things" preexists in him; i.e., his providence and the exercise of it in his government are what condition as cause everything which comes to pass in the world. Hence follows predestination: from eternity, some are destined to eternal life; while others "he permits some to fall short of that end." Reprobation, however, is more than mere foreknowledge; it is the "will of permitting anyone to fall into sin and incur the penalty of condemnation for sin." The effect of predestination is grace. Since God is the first cause of everything, he is the cause of even the free acts of men through predestination. Determinism is deeply grounded in the system of Thomas; things with their source of becoming in God are ordered from eternity as means for the realization of his end in himself. On moral grounds Thomas advocates freedom energetically; but, with his premises, he can have in mind only the psychological form of self-motivation. Nothing in the world is accidental or free, although it may appear so in reference to the proximate cause. From this point of view miracles become necessary in themselves and are to be considered merely as inexplicable to man. From the point of view of the first cause all is unchangeable; although from the limited point of view of the secondary cause miracles may be spoken of. In his doctrine of the Trinity, Thomas starts from the Augustinian system. Since God has only the functions of thinking and willing, only twoprocessiones can be asserted from the Father. However, these establish definite relations of the persons of the Trinity to each other. The relations must be conceived as real and not as merely ideal; for, as with creatures relations arise through certain accidents, since in God there is no accident but all is substance, it follows that "the relation really existing in God is the same as the essence according to the thing." From another side, however, the relations as real must be really distinguished one from another. Therefore, three persons are to be affirmed in God. Man stands opposite to God; he consists of soul and body. The "intellectual soul" consists of intellect and will. Furthermore the soul is the absolutely indivisible form of man; it is immaterial substance, but not one and the same in all men (as the Averrhoists assumed). The soul's power of knowing has two sides; a passive (the intellectus possibilis) and an active (theintellectus agens). It is the capacity to form concepts and to abstract the mind's images (species) from the objects perceived by sense. However, since the abstractions of the intellect from individual things is a universal, the mind knows the universal primarily and directly, and knows the singular only indirectly by virtue of a certain reflection. As certain principles are immanent in the mind for its speculative activity, so also a "special disposition of works," or the synderesis (rudiment of conscience), is inborn in the scholastics. Held to creationism, they therefore taught that the souls are created by God. Two things according to Thomas constituted man's righteousness in paradise-the justitia originalis or the harmony of all man's powers before they were blighted by desire, and the possession of the gratia gratum faciens(the continuous indwelling power of good). Both are lost through original sin, which in form is the "loss of original righteousness." The consequence of this loss is the disorder and maiming of man's nature, which shows itself in "ignorance, malice, moral weakness, and especially in concupiscentia, which is the material principle of original sin." The course of thought here is as follows: when the first man transgressed the order of his nature appointed by nature and grace, he, and with him the human race, lost this order. This negative state is the essence of original sin. From it follow an impairment and perversion of human nature in which thenceforth lower aims rule contrary to nature and release the lower element in man. Since sin is contrary to the divine order, it is guilt, and subject to punishment. Guilt and punishment correspond to each other; and since the "apostasy from the invariable good which is infinite," fulfilled by man, is unending, it merits everlasting punishment.

c. The Summa Part III: Christ

The way which leads to God is Christ: and Christ is the theme of part III. It can not be asserted that the incarnation was absolutely necessary, "since God in his omnipotent power could have repaired human nature in many other ways": but it was the most suitable way both for the purpose of instruction and of satisfaction. The unio between the logos and the human nature is a "relation" between the divine and the human nature which comes about by both natures being brought together in the one person of the logos. An incarnation can be spoken of only in the sense that the human nature began to be in the eternal hypostasis of the divine nature. So Christ is unum since his human nature lacks the hypostasis. The person of the logos, accordingly, has assumed the impersonal human nature, and in such way that the assumption of the soul became the means for the assumption of the body. This union with the human soul is the gratia unionis which leads to the impartation of the gratia habitualis from the logos to the human nature. Thereby all human potentialities are made perfect in Jesus. Besides the perfections given by the vision of God, which Jesus enjoyed from the beginning, he receives all others by the gratia habitualis. In so far, however, as it is the limited human nature which receives these perfections, they are finite. This holds both of the knowledge and the will of Christ. The logos impresses the species intelligibiles of all created things on the soul, but the intellectus agens transforms them gradually into the impressions of sense. On another side, the soul of Christ works miracles only as instrument of the logos, since omnipotence in no way appertains to this human soul in itself. Furthermore, Christ's human nature partook of imperfections, on the one side to make his true humanity evident, on another side because he would bear the general consequences of sin for humanity. Christ experienced suffering, but blessedness reigned in his soul, which, however, did not extend to his body. Concerning redemption, Thomas teaches that Christ is to be regarded as redeemer after his human nature but in such way that the human nature produces divine effects as organ of divinity. The one side of the work of redemption consists herein, that Christ as head of humanity imparts perfection and virtue to his members. He is the teacher and example of humanity; his whole life and suffering as well as his work after he is exalted serve this end.

This is the first course of thought. Then follows a second complex of thoughts which has the idea of satisfaction as its center. To be sure, God as the highest being could forgive sins without satisfaction; but because his justice and mercy could be best revealed through satisfaction he chose this way. As little, however, as satisfaction is necessary in itself, so little does it offer an equivalent, in a correct sense, for guilt; it is rather a "super-abundant satisfaction," since on account of the divine subject in Christ in a certain sense his suffering and activity are infinite. With this thought the strict logical deduction of Anselm's theory is given up. Christ's suffering bore personal character in that it proceeded out of love and obedience. It was an offering brought to God, which as personal act had the character of merit. Thereby Christ "merited" salvation for men. As Christ still influences men, so does he still work in their behalf continually in heaven through the intercession (interpellatio). In this way Christ as head of humanity effects the forgiveness of their sins, their reconciliation with God, their immunity from punishment, deliverance from the devil, and the opening of heaven's gate. But inasmuch as all these benefits are already offered through the inner operation of the love of Christ, Thomas has combined the theories of Anselm and Abelard by joining the one to the other.

3. The Sacraments

The doctrine of the sacraments follows the Christology; for the sacraments "have efficacy from the incarnate Word himself." The sacraments are signs which not only signify sanctification, but also effect it. That they bring spiritual gifts in sensuous form, moreover, is inevitable because of the sensuous nature of man. The res sensibles are the matter, the words of institution are the form of the sacranieits. Contrary to the Franciscan view that the sacraments are mere symbol, whose efficacy God accompanies with a directly following creative act in the soul, Thomas holds it not unfit to say with Hugo of St. Victor that "a sacrament contains grace," or to teach of the sacraments that they "cause grace." Thomas attempts to remove the difficulty of a sensuous thing producing a creative effect by a distinction between the causa principalis et instrumentalism. God as the principal cause works through the sensuous thing as the means ordained by him for his end. "Just as instrumental power is acquired by the instrument from this, that it is moved by the principal agent, so also the sacrament obtains spiritual power from the benediction of Christ and the application of the minister to the use of the sacrament. There is spiritual power in the sacraments in so far as they have been ordained by God for a spiritual effect." This spiritual power remains in the sensuous thing until it has attained its purpose. Thomas distinguished the gratia sacramentalis from the gratia virtutum et donorum in that the former in general perfects the essence and the powers of the soul, and the latter in particular brings to pass necessary spiritual effects for the Christian life. Although, later this distinction was ignored.

In a single statement the effect of the sacraments is to infuse justifying grace into men. Christ's humanity was the instrument for the operation of his divinity; the sacraments are the instruments through which this operation of Christ's humanity passes over to men. Christ's humanity served his divinity as instrumentum conjuncture, like the hand; the sacraments are instruments separate, like a staff; the former can use the latter, as the hand can use a staff.

Of Thomas' eschatology, according to the commentary on the "Sentences," only a brief account can here be given. Everlasting blessedness consists for Thomas in the vision of God; and this vision consists not in an abstraction or in a mental image supernaturally produced, but the divine substance itself is beheld. In such a manner, God himself becomes immediately the form of the beholding intellect; that is, God is the object of the vision and at the same time causes the vision. The perfection of the blessed also demands that the body be restored to the soul as something to be made perfect by it. Since blessedness consist in operation, it is made more perfect in that the soul has a definite opcralio with the body. Although, the peculiar act of blessedness (that is, the vision of God) has nothing to do with the body.

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Thomas Aquinas: Political Philosophy

aquinasThe political philosophy of Thomas Aquinas (1225-1274), along with the broader philosophical teaching of which it is part, stands at the crossroads between the Christian gospel and the Aristotelian political doctrine that was, in Aquinas' time, newly discovered in the Western world. In fact, Aquinas' whole developed system is often understood to be simply a modification of Aristotelian philosophy in light of the Christian gospel and with special emphasis upon those questions most relevant to Christianity, such as the nature of the divine, the human soul, and morality. This generalization would explain why Aquinas seems to eschew, even neglect, the subject of politics. Unlike his medieval Jewish and Islamic counterparts, Aquinas does not have to reconcile Aristotelianism with a concrete political and legal code specified in the sacred writings of his religion. As far as he is concerned, God no longer requires people to live according to the judicial precepts of the Old Law (Summa Theologiae [hereafter ST], I-II, 104.3), and so the question of formulating a comprehensive Christian political teaching that is faithful to biblical principles loses it urgency if not its very possibility. Unlike Judaism and Islam, Christianity does not involve specific requirements for conducting civil society. In fact, most Christians before Aquinas' time (such as St. Augustine) had interpreted Jesus' assertion that we should "render unto Caesar the things that are Caesar's" (Matthew22:21) to mean that Christianity can flourish in any political regime so long as its authorities permit believers to "render unto God the things that are God's." Although Jesus claimed to be a king, he was quick to add that his kingdom was not of this world (John 18:36), and whereas St. Paul had exhorted Christians to obey the civil authorities and even to suffer injustice willingly, he never considered it necessary to discuss the nature of political justice itself.

These observations perhaps explain why Aquinas, whose writings nearly all come in the form of extremely well organized and systematic treatises, never completed a thematic discussion of politics. His letter On Kingship (written as a favor to the king of Cyprus) comes closest to fitting the description of a political treatise, and yet this brief and unfinished work hardly presents a comprehensive treatment of political philosophy. Even his commentary on Aristotle's Politics is less than half complete, and it is debatable whether this work is even intended to express Aquinas' own political philosophy at all. This does not mean, however, that Aquinas was uninterested in political philosophy or that he simply relied on Aristotle to provide the missing political teaching that Christianity leaves out. Nor does it mean that Aquinas does not have a political teaching. Although it is not expressed in overtly political works, Aquinas' thoughts on political philosophy may be found within treatises that contain discussions of issues with far reaching political implications. In his celebrated Summa Theologiae, for instance, Aquinas engages in long discussions of law, the virtue of justice, the common good, economics, and the basis of morality. Even though not presented in the context of a comprehensive political teaching, these texts provide a crucial insight into Aquinas' understanding of politics and the place of political philosophy within his thought.

Table of Contents

  1. Natural Law
  2. The Political Nature of Man
  3. Human Legislation
  4. The Requirements of Justice
  5. The Limitations of Politics
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
      1. Aquinas' Political Writings in English
      2. Two Useful Collections of Aquinas' Political Writings in English
    2. Secondary Sources
      1. Books
      2. Articles and Chapters

1. Natural Law

Aquinas' celebrated doctrine of natural law no doubt plays a central role in his moral and political teaching. According to Aquinas, everything in the terrestrial world is created by God and endowed with a certain nature that defines what each sort of being is in its essence. A thing's nature is detectable not only in its external appearance, but also and more importantly through the natural inclinations which guide it to behave in conformity with the particular nature it has. As Aquinas argues, God's authorship and active role in prescribing and sustaining the various natures included in creation may rightfully be called a law. After defining law as "an ordinance of reason for the common good, made by someone who has care of the community, and promulgated." (ST, I-II, 90.4), Aquinas explains that the entire universe is governed by the supreme lawgiver par excellence: "Granted that the world is ruled by Divine Providence...the whole community of the universe is governed by Divine Reason." (ST, I-II, 91.1). Even though the world governed by God's providence is temporal and limited, Aquinas calls the law that governs it the "eternal law." Its eternal nature comes not from that to which it applies, but rather from whom the law is derived, namely, God. As Aquinas explains, "the very idea of the government of things in God the Ruler of the universe, has the nature of a law. And since Divine Reason's conception of things is not subject to time but is eternal, according to Prov. viii, 23...this kind of law must be called eternal." (Ibid.).

In the vast majority of cases, God governs his subjects through the eternal law without any possibility that that law might be disobeyed. This, of course, is because most beings in the universe (or at least in the natural world) do not possess the rational ability to act consciously in a way that is contrary to the eternal law implanted in them. Completely unique among natural things, however, are humans who, although completely subject to divine providence and the eternal law, possess the power of free choice and therefore have a radically different relation to that law. As Aquinas explains, "among all others, the rational creature is subject to Divine Providence in the most excellent way, in so far as it partakes of a share of providence, by being provident both for itself, and for others. Wherefore, it has a share of the Eternal Reason, whereby it has a natural inclination to its proper act and end." (ST, I-II, 91.2). Because the rational creature's relation to the eternal law is so different from that of any other created thing, Aquinas prefers to call the law that governs it by a different name. Instead of saying that humans are under the eternal law, therefore, he says they are under the natural law, and yet "the natural law is nothing else than the rational creature's participation of the eternal law" (Ibid.). Another, equally accurate, way of stating Aquinas' position is that the natural law is the eternal law as it applies to human beings.

As the "rule and measure" of human behavior, the natural law provides the only possible basis for morality and politics. Simply stated, the natural law guides human beings through their fundamental inclinations toward the natural perfection that God, the author of the natural law, intends for them. As we have seen, however, the human subjugation to the eternal law (called the natural law) is always concomitant with a certain awareness the human subject has of the law binding him. This awareness is crucial in Aquinas' view. Since one of the essential components of law is to be promulgated, the natural law would lose its legal character if human beings did not have the principles of that law instilled in their minds (ST, I-II, 90.4 ad 1). For this reason Aquinas considers the natural law to be a habit, not in itself, but because the principles (or precepts) of the natural law are naturally held in our minds by means of an intellectual habit, which Aquinas calls synderesisSynderisis denotes a natural knowledge held by all people instructing them as to the fundamental moral requirements of their human nature. As Aquinas explains, just as speculative knowledge requires there to be certain principles from which one can draw further conclusions, so also practical and moral knowledge presupposes an understanding of fundamental practical precepts from which more concrete moral directives may be derived. Whereas Aquinas calls the habit by which human beings understand the first moral principles (which are also the first principles of the natural law) synderesis (ST, Ia, 79.12), he calls the act by which one applies that understanding to concrete situations conscience (ST, Ia, 79.13). Therefore, by means of synderesis a man would know that the act of adultery is morally wrong and contrary to the natural law. By an act of conscience he would reason that intercourse with this particular woman that is not his wife is an act of adultery and should therefore be avoided. Thus understood, the natural law includes principles that are universally accessible regardless of time, place, or culture. In Aquinas' words, it is the same in all humans (ST, I-II, 94.4), unchangeable (ST, I-II, 94.5), and cannot be abolished from the hearts of men (ST, I-II, 94.6). It is in light of this teaching that Aquinas interprets St. Paul's argument that the "Gentiles who have not the law do by nature what the law requires, they are a law to themselves, even though they do not have the law. They show that what the law requires is written on their hearts." (Romans 2:14-16).

How are the precepts of the natural law derived? According to Aquinas, the very first precept is that "good is to be done and pursued and evil is to be avoided." (ST, I-II, 94.2). As he explains, this principle serves the practical reason just as the principle of non-contradiction serves the speculative reason. Just as the speculative intellect naturally apprehends the fact that "the same thing cannot be affirmed and denied at the same time," the practical intellect apprehends that good is to be pursued and evil is to be avoided. By definition, neither the first principle of speculative nor practical reason can be demonstrated. Rather, they are principles without which human reasoning cannot coherently draw any conclusions whatsoever. Otherwise stated, they are first principles inasmuch as they are not derived from any prior practical or speculative knowledge. Still, they are just as surely known as any other knowledge obtained through demonstrative reasoning. In fact, they are naturally known and self-evident for the very same reason that they are not subject to demonstration. This is important from Aquinas' perspective because all practical knowledge (including the moral and political sciences) must rest upon certain principles before any valid conclusions are drawn. To return to the above example, a man who recognizes the evil of adultery will only know that this act of adultery must be avoided if he first understands the more fundamental precept that evil ought to be avoided in general. No one can prove this general principle to him. He simply understands it by the habit of synderesis.

Aquinas would be the first to recognize, of course, that the simple requirements of doing good and avoiding evil fail to provide human beings with much content for pursuing the moral life. How, one must ask, do we know what things actually are good and evil? In response to this Aquinas argues that human beings must consult their natural inclinations. Beyond the mere knowledge that good is to be pursued and evil avoided our natural inclinations are the most fundamental guide to understanding where the natural law is directing us. In other words, our natural inclinations reveal to us what the most fundamental human goods are. As Aquinas explains, man first has natural inclinations "in accordance with the nature he has in common with all substances...such as preserving human life and warding off its obstacles." Secondly, there are inclinations we have in common with other animals, such as "sexual intercourse," the "education of offspring and so forth." And finally there are inclinations specific to man's rational nature, such as the inclination to "know the truth about God," to "shun ignorance," and to "live in society." (Ibid.). It may seem strange that Aquinas would list the pursuit of "sexual intercourse" as one of the natural inclinations supporting and defining the natural law. To be sure, Aquinas recognizes that all the aforementioned inclinations are subject to the corruption of our sinful nature. It is not morally good, therefore, simply to act on an inclination. One must first recognize the natural purpose of a given inclination and only act upon it insofar as that purpose is respected. This is why Aquinas is quick to add that all inclinations belong to the natural law only insofar as they are "ruled by reason." (ST, I-II, 94.2, ad 2). As someone is inclined to sexual intercourse, for instance, he must also recognize that this natural good must be pursued only within a certain context (that is, within marriage, open to the possibility of procreation, etc.). If this natural order of reason is ignored, any natural good (even knowledge [ST, II-II, 167]) can be pursued in an inappropriate way that is actually contrary to the natural law.

2. The Political Nature of Man

As we have seen, Aquinas mentions that one of the natural goods to which human beings are inclined is "to live in society." This remark presents the ideal point of departure for one of the most important teachings of Thomistic political philosophy, namely, the political nature of man. This doctrine is taken primarily from the first book of Aristotle's Politics upon which Aquinas wrote an extensive commentary (although the commentary is only completed through book 3, chapter 8 of Aristotle's Politics, Aquinas seems to have commented upon what he considered to be the Politics' theoretical core.). Following "the Philosopher" Aquinas believes that political society (civitas) emerges from the needs and aspirations of human nature itself. Thus understood, it is not an invention of human ingenuity (as in the political teachings of modern social contract theorists) nor an artificial construction designed to make up for human nature's shortcomings. It is, rather, a prompting of nature itself that sets humans apart from all other natural creatures. To be sure, political society is not simply given by nature. It is rather something to which human beings naturally aspire and which is necessary for the full perfection of their existence. The capacity for political society is not natural to man, therefore, in the same way as the five senses are natural. The naturalness of politics is more appropriately compared to the naturalness of moral virtue (Commentary on the Politics, Book 1, Lesson 1 [40]). Even though human beings are inclined to moral virtue, acquiring the virtues nonetheless requires both education and habituation. In the same way, even though human beings are inclined to live in political societies, such societies must still be established, built, and maintained by human industry. To be fully human is to live in political society, and Aquinas makes a great deal of Aristotle's claim that one who is separated from society so as to be completely a-political must be either sub-human or super-human, either a "beast or a god." (Aristotle's Politics, 1253a27; Cf. Aquinas'Commentary, Book 1, Lesson 1 [39]).

Aquinas admits, of course, that political society is not the only natural community. The family is natural in perhaps an even stronger sense and is prior to political society. The priority of the family, however, is not a priority of importance, since politics aims at a higher and nobler good than the family. It is rather a priority of development. In other words, politics surpasses all other communities in dignity while at the same time depending upon and presupposing the family. On this point Aquinas follows Aristotle's explanation of how political society develops from other lower societies including both the family and the village. The human family comes into existence from the nearly universal tendency of males and females joining together for purposes of procreation. Humans share with other animals (and even plants) a "natural appetite to leave after them another being like themselves," (Commentary on the Politics, Book 1, Lesson 1 [18]) and immediately see the utility if not the necessity of both parents remaining available to provide for the needs of the children and one another. As families grow in size and number there also seems to be a tendency for them to gravitate towards one another and form villages. The reasons for this are primarily utilitarian. Whereas the household suffices for providing the daily necessities of life, the village is necessary for providing non-daily commodities (Commentary on the Politics, Book 1, Lesson 1 [27]). What Aquinas and Aristotle seem to have in mind in describing the emergence of the village is the division of labor. Whereas humans can reproduce and survive quite easily in families, life becomes much more productive and affluent when families come together in villages, since one man can now specialize in a certain task while fulfilling his family's remaining material needs through barter and trade.

Despite the village's usefulness to man, it nevertheless leaves him incomplete. This is partly because the village is still relatively small and so the effectiveness of the division of labor remains limited. Much more useful is the conglomeration of several villages, which provides a wider variety of commodities and specializations to be shared by means of exchange (Commentary on the Politics Book 1, Lesson 1 [31]). This is one reason why the village is eclipsed by political society, which proves much more useful to human beings because of its greater size and much more elaborate governmental structure. There is, however, a far more important reason why political society comes into existence. In addition to yielding greater protection and economic benefits, it also enhances the moral and intellectual lives of human beings. By identifying with a political community, human beings begin to see the world in broader terms than the mere satisfaction of their bodily desires and physical needs. Whereas the residents of the village better serve their individual interests, the goal of the political community becomes the good of the whole, or the common good, which Aquinas claims (following Aristotle) is "better and more divine than the good of the individual." (Commentary on the Politics, Book 1, Lesson 1 [11]). The political community is thus understood as the first community (larger than the family) for which the individual makes great sacrifices, since it is not merely a larger cooperative venture for mutual economic benefit. It is, rather, the social setting in which man truly finds his highest natural fulfillment. In this sense, the political community, even though not directed to the individual good, better serves the individual by promoting a life of virtue in which human existence can be greatly ennobled. It is in this context that Aquinas argues (again following Aristotle) that although political society originally comes into being for the sake of living, it exists for the sake of "living well." (Commentary on the Politics, Book 1, Lesson 1 [31]).

Aquinas takes Aristotle's argument that political society transcends the village and completes human social existence to prove that the city is natural. Similar, but not identical, to this claim is Aquinas' further assertion that man is by nature a "civic and social animal." (ST, I-II, 72.4). To support this, Aquinas refers us to Aristotle's observation that human beings are the only animals possessing the ability to exercise speech. Not to be confused with mere voice (vox), speech (loquutio) involves the communication of thoughts and concepts between persons (ST, I-II, 72.4). Whereas voice is found in many different animals that communicate their immediate desires and aversions to one another (seen in the dog's bark and the lion's roar) speech includes a conscious conception of what one is saying (Commentary on the Politics, Book 1, Lecture 1 [36]). By means of speech, therefore, human beings may collectively deliberate on core civic matters regarding "what is useful and what is harmful," as well as "the just and the unjust." (Commentary on the Politics, Book 1, Lecture 1 [37]). Whereas other animals exhibit a certain social tendency (as bees instinctively work to preserve their hive), only humans are social in the sense that they cooperate through speech to pursue a common understanding of justice, virtue, and the good. Since speech is the outward expression of his inner rationality, man is political by nature for the same reason he is naturally rational.

The fact that man is a naturally political animal has far-reaching implications. In addition to being a father, a mother, a farmer, or a teacher, a human being is more importantly identified as a citizen. Achieving genuine human excellence, therefore, most always means achieving excellence as a citizen of some political society (Aquinas does mention the possibility that someone's supernatural calling may necessitate that they live outside of political society. As examples of such people, he mentions "John the Baptist and Blessed Anthony the hermit." See his Commentary on the Politics, Book 1, Lecture 1 [35].). To be sure, the requirements of good citizenship vary from regime to regime, but more generally conceived the good citizen is the one that places the common good above his own private good and acts accordingly. In doing so, such a person exhibits the virtue of legal justice whereby all of his actions are referred in one way or another to the common good of his particular society (ST, II-II, 58.5). Following the progression of Aristotle's discussion of citizenship, however, Aquinas recognizes a certain difficulty in assigning an unqualifiedly high value to citizenship. What sense does it make to speak of a good citizen in a bad regime? One does not need to consider the worst sorts of regimes to see the difficulty inherent in achieving good citizenship. In any regime that is less than perfect there always remains the possibility that promoting the interests of the regime and promoting the common good may not be the same. To be sure, good men are often called to stand up heroically against tyrants (ST, II-II, 42.2, ad 3), but the full potential of the good citizen will never be realized unless he lives in best of all possible regimes. In other words, only in the best regime do the good citizen and the good human being coincide (Commentary on the Politics, Book 3, Lecture 3 [366]). In fact, even the best regime will fall short of producing a multitude of good citizens, since no society exists where everyone is virtuous (Commentary on the Politics, Book 3, Lecture 3 [367]).

But what is the best regime? Following Aristotle, Aquinas argues that all regimes can be divided into six basic types, which are determined according to two criteria: how the regime is ruled and whether or not it is ruled justly (that is, for the common good). As he explains, political rule may be exercised by the multitude, by a select few, or by one person. If the regime is ruled justly, it is called a monarchy or kingship when ruled by one single individual, an aristocracy when ruled by a few, and a polity or republic when ruled by the multitude. If, on the other hand, a regime is ruled unjustly (that is, for the sake of the ruler(s) and not for the common weal), it is called a tyranny when ruled by one, an oligarchy when ruled by a few, and a democracy when ruled by the multitude (On Kingship, Book 1, Chapter 1;Commentary on the Politics, Book 3, Lecture 6 [393-394]). Simply Stated, the best regime is monarchy. Aquinas' argument for this is drawn from a mixture of philosophical and theological observations. Inasmuch as the goal of any ruler should be the "unity of peace," the regime is better governed by one person rather than by many. For this end is much more efficaciously secured by a single wise authority who is not burdened by having to deliberate with others who may be less wise and who may stand in the way of effective governance. As Aquinas observes in his letter On Kingship, any governing body comprised of many must always strive to act as one in order to move the regime closer to the intended goal. In this sense, therefore, the less perfect regimes tend to imitate monarchy in which unanimity of rule is realized at once and without obstruction (On Kingship, Book 1, Chapter 2). This conclusion is confirmed by the example of nature, which always "does what is best." For the many powers of the human soul are governed by a single power, i.e., reason. A hive of bees is ruled by a single bee, i.e., the queen. And most convincingly of all, the universe is governed by the single authority of God, "Maker and Ruler of all things." As art is called to imitate nature, human society is therefore best that is governed by a single authority of a eminently wise and just monarch who resembles God as much as humanly possible.

Aquinas is well aware, of course, that such a monarch is not always available in political societies, and even where he is available it is not always guaranteed that the conditions will be right to grant him the political authority he ought to wield. Even worse, there is always the danger that the monarch will be corrupted and become a tyrant. In this case the best of all regimes has the greatest tendency to become the worst. This is why, whereas monarchy is the best regime simply speaking, it is not always the best regime in a particular time and place, which is to say it is certainly not always the best possible regime. Therefore, Aquinas outlines in the Summa Theologiae a more modest proposal whereby political rule is somewhat decentralized. The regime that he recommends takes the positive dimensions of all three "good regimes." Whereas it has a monarch at its head, it is also governed by "others" possessing a certain degree of authority who may advise the monarch while curbing any tyrannical tendencies he may have. Finally, Aquinas suggests that the entire multitude of citizens should be responsible for selecting the monarch and should all be candidates for political authority themselves. Whereas the best regime simply speaking is monarchy, the best possible regime seems to be the mixed government that incorporates the positive dimensions of monarchy, aristocracy, and democracy (In the Summa Theologiae, Aquinas appears to use the name of democracy in place of Aristotle's conception of polity.). To support this conclusion, Aquinas is able to cite the Hebrew form of government established by God in the Old Testament. Whereas Moses (and his successors) ruled the Jews as a monarch, there also existed a council of seventy-two elders which provided "an element of aristocracy." Inasmuch as the rulers were selected from among the people, this sacred regime of the Bible also incorporated a certain dimension of democracy (ST, I-II, 105.1).

3. Human Legislation

The fact that regimes may vary according to time and place is a perfect example of the fact that not every moral or political directive is specified by nature. In fact, Aquinas is eager to point out that the natural law, while providing the fundamental basis for human action and politics, fails to provide specific requirements for all the details of human social existence. For example, whereas the natural law does provide certain general standards of economic justice (which we shall consider later on), it does not give a preferred form of currency. There is no natural law that requires how often public roads should be repaired, or whether military service will be mandatory or voluntary. Whereas Aquinas argues that the natural law requires criminals to be punished for injustices such as murder, theft, and assault, there is no natural specification as to precisely what kinds of punishments ought to be imposed for these crimes. Even though, as Aquinas recognizes, these details do not pertain directly to whether a regime is good or bad, human social life would be impossible to maintain without attention to such detail. Such is the role, according to Aquinas, of human law (ST, I-II, 91.3).

This is not to suggest, of course, that human laws only concern those matters which may just as easily be decided one way or another. Within a particular socio-political context, it may indeed be a terrible mistake to make military service compulsory or in another context to punish treason with leniency, even though the natural law does not specify which situations call for which measures. Additionally, human law is necessary to enforce the moral and political requirements of the natural law that may go unheeded. Even though the precepts of the natural law are available to human reason when it considers matters rightly, not all human beings use their practical reason to its fullest capacity and some act maliciously even when they happen to know better. And because the natural law does not simply enforce itself, the basic requirements of justice must be bolstered by an organized and civilized human authority (ST, I-II, 95.1). Accordingly, human laws serve two purposes. First, they provide the missing details that the natural law leaves out due to its generality. Secondly, they compel those under the law to observe those standards of justice and morality even about which the natural law does specify. This second function of human law leads Aquinas to a crucial distinction. After asking whether human laws are derived from the natural law, he argues that, although all human laws are derived from the natural law in a certain sense, some are more directly derived than others. The distinction he invokes is that between human laws which constitute "conclusions" from principles of natural law and those which constitute "determinations" from the natural law. Human laws are considered conclusions from the natural law when they pertain to those matters about which the natural law offers a clear precept. To use Aquinas' own example, "that one must not kill may be derived as a conclusion from the principle that one should do harm to no man." (ST, I-II, 95.2). Thus, human laws must include prohibitions against murder, assault, and the like even though such actions are already prohibited by the natural law. At the same time, however, the natural law does not specify exactly how a murderer must be punished, whether (for example) by means of banishment, the death penalty, or imprisonment. Such details depend upon a number of factors that prudent legislators and judges must take into consideration apart from their understanding of the general principles of natural justice. According to Aquinas, those dictates of natural reason which human beings should recognize as directly pertaining to the natural law, and which are therefore common principles of human law in many different regimes, are embodied in something called the "law of nations" [ius gentium]. Strictly speaking, the law of nations is a human law derived as a set of conclusions from the natural law. On the other hand, the law of nations is not the law of any particular regime and for this reason is sometimes equated with the natural law itself. For Aquinas' treatment of the law of nations (see ST, I-II, 95.4 and ST, II-II, 57.3). Such details are the bases of human laws that Aquinas calls determinations from the natural law. It is important to note that both conclusions and determinations are based on the natural law in some way, for the question of how a murderer or a thief ought to be punished would be meaningless without the more general requirement (found in the natural law itself) that injustice must be met with a punishment that in some way fits the crime. To consider the matter by way of analogy, we may take note of Aquinas' own example in the Summa Theologiae. As he explains, legislators rely upon their understanding of the natural law in the same way that craftsmen must use the "general form of a house" before they build a particular house to which many architectural details may be added (ST, I-II, 95.2). To press the analogy further, just as all houses must be built according to certain general principles (e.g., all houses must have a roof, a foundation, windows, at least one door, etc.), so also all political regimes must enforce certain human laws as conclusions from the natural law (e.g., prohibitions against murder, theft, adultery, and assault). In the same way, just as a house under construction may exhibit a wide array of details not belonging to the "general form" of a house (e.g., some houses have a brick foundation and some are on a concrete slab, some are heated with oil and some with natural gas, etc.), so also political regimes may vary according to similarly non-essential details that Aquinas would call determinations of the natural law (e.g., determining specific punishments for specific crimes).

In Aquinas' view, human laws are essential for the maintenance of any organized and civilized society. At the same time, however, Aquinas understands human laws to be somewhat limited in scope. Several passages in the Summa Theologiae testify to this, including Aquinas' comparison between human law and divine law. As he explains, the very reason why divine law is necessary pertains directly to those areas where human law (and even natural law) fall short. The most obvious example of this is the simple fact that human laws may be in error. Regardless of whether they are intended to be conclusions or determinations of the natural law, human laws are made by fallible human beings and may often tend to hinder the common good rather than promote it. Secondly, Aquinas argues that, given certain circumstances, some human laws may simply fail to apply. This does not necessarily mean that such laws are unjust or even erroneously enacted. Aquinas suggests, rather, that there sometimes arise situations in which securing the common good requires actions that violate the letter of the law. For example, a law that requires the city gates to remain closed during certain times may need to be broken to allow citizens to enter as they are pursued by enemy forces (ST, I-II, 96.6; II-II, 120.1). Thirdly, Aquinas explains that human law is unable to direct the interior acts of a man's soul. As a result, human law has a difficult time directing people toward the path of virtue, since genuine human goodness depends not only on external actions but upon interior movements of the soul, which are hidden. This is not to say that the coercive power of human law may not play some role in leading people to virtue, or even that virtue should not be an express goal of human law (that virtue is an express goal of human law, see ST, I-II, 92.1, 95.1.). It only means that the power of human law is limited by the fallible intellects of the human beings who enforce it and who only see a person's external actions. Finally, human law is unable to "punish or forbid all evil deeds." (ST, I-II, 91.4). By this Aquinas means that human laws must concentrate upon hindering those sorts of behaviors that are most damaging to the commonwealth. Aquinas elaborates upon this by saying that the political community would "do away with many good things" if it attempted to forbid all vices and punish every act that is judged to be immoral. Thus understood, human legislators must remember that most of their subjects need to be governed in relation to their limited capacity for virtue. As a result, "human laws do not forbid all vices, from which the virtuous abstain, but only the more grievous vices, from which it is possible for the majority to abstain; and chiefly those that are to the hurt of others, without the prohibition of which human society could not be maintained: thus human law prohibits murder, theft, and suchlike." (ST, I-II, 96.2).

4. The Requirements of Justice

As we have seen, Aquinas' argument for the necessity of human law includes the observation that some human beings require an additional coercive incentive to respect and promote the common good. By means of the law, those who show hostility to their fellow citizens are restrained from their evildoing through "force and fear," and may even eventually come "to do willingly what hitherto they did from fear, and become virtuous." (ST, I-II, 95.1). During this discussion, Aquinas mentions two specific dimensions of the common good that are of particular concern to human legislation. The first of these is "peace." By this term (pax), Aquinas means something considerably more mundane than any sort of "inner peace" or spiritual tranquility that one finds as a result of moral or intellectual perfection. Instead, he seems to have in mind the requirements for maintaining a social order in which citizens are free from the aggression of wrongdoers and other preventable threats to safety or livelihood. In addition to preserving social order at its most basic level, however, Aquinas also makes clear in the above passage that human law should strive to instill "virtue," and specifically that kind of virtue which has to do with the common good of society. In other words, human law is interested in instilling virtues insofar as those virtues perfect human beings in their dealings with fellow citizens and the broader community as a whole. Later in the Summa Theologiae, Aquinas calls this kind of virtue "legal justice." (ST, II-II.58.5-6; Commentary on Aristotle's Nicomachean Ethics, Book 5, Lecture 2).

According to Aquinas, legal justice is the political virtue par excellence. Contrary to what its name appears to signify, this virtue does not imply simple obedience to the law. It means, rather, an inner disposition of the human will by which those possessing it refer all their actions to the common good (Aquinas follows Aristotle in calling it "legal" justice because the law, too, has the common good as its proper object. See his Commentary on Aristotle's Nicomachean Ethics, Book 5, Lecture 2 [902]). Thus understood, Aquinas (again following Aristotle) considers it to be a "general virtue." By this he means that legal justice embraces any act of virtue whatsoever, so long as the agent refers his action to legal justice's proper object. To use Aquinas' example, fortitude is normally considered to be a virtue distinct from justice, since fortitude deals with the perfection of the irascible appetite and a person's ability to overcome fear, whereas justice deals with the perfection of the will and a person's dealings with others. However, a particular act of fortitude may be referred to the common good as its object and thus become an act of justice as well. For example, a soldier who rushes into battle displays fortitude by overcoming his fear of death, but he also displays justice if he is motivated by a love for the common good of the society he protects. Considered specifically, his action is courageous. Considered generally, it is an act of justice. As Aquinas explains, "the good of any virtue, whether such virtue direct man in relation to himself, or in relation to certain other individual persons, is referable to the common good, to which justice directs: so that all acts of virtue can pertain to justice, insofar as it directs man to the common good." (ST, II-II, 58.5).

In addition to considering justice generally, however, Aquinas also considers it as a particular virtue of its own. This seems to explain why he mentions in a later discussion of human legislation that the law should promote justice in addition to peace and virtue (ST, I-II, 96.3). Regardless of the fact that justice is a virtue that legislators would like to instill within their citizens, the law also seeks to preserve justice as a certain kind of fairness. This becomes clearer when one considers Aquinas' discussion of "right" (ius), which he characterizes as the object of justice considered as a particular virtue, and which must be safeguarded by the law regardless of whether legislators have succeeded in implanting the virtue of justice in the souls of their citizens. Strictly speaking, ius is understood by Aquinas as synonymous withiustum, or that which is just in a particular situation (ST, II-II, 57.1). Aside from making their citizens just by cultivating in them the "perpetual and constant will to render to each one his right [ius]," (ST, II-II, 58.1) legislators and judges ensure that the ius of particular situations between individuals is established or restored, that each person receives what is "due" to him such that a certain equality is maintained among citizens. When a judge orders a person to pay $100 to another for a service rendered, for example, that judge reestablishes the equality of their relationship before the service was performed. In such a case, the $100 owed to the provider of the service is his ius, which must be returned if justice in this case is to be accomplished. Again, this is not a sense of justice according to which the one paying his debt necessarily exhibits the virtue of justice, but in the sense that his actions (proceeding from any motivation whatsoever) reestablish that certain equality which can only be restored if the one who owes renders no more and no less of his debt to the one who is owed. To exhibit the virtue of justice, therefore, is much more than to perform an action that reestablishes the equality of justice or renders to someone his ius, and yet without the notion of ius, Aquinas' concept of justice as a virtue would be unintelligible. This is why the concept of ius lies especially at the core of that part of justice which Aquinas characterizes as "particular." In contrast to the general virtue of legal justice, which directs the acts of the other specific virtues to the common good, particular justice always includes some person or group who owes some sort of identifiable debt to another.

In explaining the details of particular justice, Aquinas further distinguishes between commutative justice and distributive justice. The example above involving one person owing $100 to another for a service rendered would be an example of commutative justice, because it involves one private individual's debt to another private individual. It may happen, however, that something is owed to a person by the community as a whole. In this case the community distributes things according to what each individual deserves. An example of this sort of debt would be found in the realm of punitive justice. Since the punishment of criminals is not a matter pertaining to private citizens, but society as a whole (ST, I-II, 92.2 ad 3), a political community owes a certain amount of punishment that must be inflicted upon a criminal if the equality of justice is to be restored. The degree of punishment, furthermore, constitutes the ius of the particular situation. Therefore, just as in matters of exchange, where it would be unjust to fall short of or exceed the ius between buyers and sellers, it would likewise be unjust for a society to punish more or less than the criminal deserves. In addition to punishment, a political society may distribute such things as wealth, honor, material necessities, or work. As Aquinas explains, however, distributive justice seldom requires that society render an equal amount (good or bad) to its members. Following Aristotle's teaching in the Nicomachean Ethics, Aquinas argues that the ius of distributive justice must be calculated according to a "geometrical proportion." By this he simply means that more should be given to those who deserve more and less to those who deserve less. To return to the example of punishment, it would be gravely unfair to punish a murderer with the same penalty as a shoplifter. The equality that justice requires must be considered proportionally in the sense that greater punishments for greater crimes (and lesser punishments for lesser crimes) do in fact constitute equal treatment (Summa Contra Gentiles, III.142 [2]). Such is not the case in matters of commutative justice such as buying and selling, which Aquinas says must follow an "arithmetic proportion." By this Aquinas simply means that the good or service provided must be proportional to the value of the currency or commodity for which it is exchanged (ST, II-II, 61.2;Commentary on Aristotle's Nicomachean Ethics, Book 5, Lecture 5).

To observe how this teaching is applied to particular situations in the political community, it is helpful to consider Aquinas' famous discussion of usury. Usury inherently constitutes a violation of commutative justice, according to Aquinas, because it creates an unfair inequality among those private individuals in society. Aquinas' logic is extremely straightforward. If I lend someone $1000 there exists a $1000 disparity in his favor. The fact that he owes me this sum of money means that there now exists a ius that obliges him to pay me back the money he borrowed. If, however, I charge him a 10 percent fee for the use of the money lent, I require him to pay back $100 more than he originally borrowed. According to Aquinas, by doing this I would be charging him $100 more than what I am entitled to receive. Since he only borrowed $1000, he should only have to pay me back $1000.

Aquinas' condemnation of usury has little to do with the idea that money should only be lent from the motive of generosity (even if this happens to be a consequence). It is, rather, based on his notion of the nature of money itself. Contrary to most modern economic theories, Aquinas understands money to be nothing more than a medium for exchanging commodities and thus subject to the requirements of commutative justice. Any use of money beyond this purpose distorts its original function. If money can ever be considered a commodity in its own right, it should be compared to those commodities whose use "consists in their consumption." (ST, II-II, 78.1). Its exchange value is more akin to something like food or wine than to a house or a tool. When someone lends his house to be used, it makes perfect sense to charge rent and also to repossess the house when the allotted time for renting has expired. On the other hand, it would be quite unreasonable for a grocer to charge a fee for his food and then additionally to demand the food back after it is used. As Aquinas explains, the exchange value of money should be considered more like food than a house: "Now money, according to the Philosopher, was invented chiefly for the purpose of exchange: and consequently the proper and principal use of money is consumption or alienation whereby it is sunk in exchange. Hence it is by its very nature unlawful to take payment for the use of money lent." (It is necessary to add that Aquinas does allow lenders to require an additional fee under two conditions. The first would be if money is lent to someone entering a business venture in which the lender shares some of the risk [periculum]. If, for example, I lend someone $1000 to invest in renting a vineyard, I am entitled to a share in his profits so long as I also agree to lose some or all of my money if the investment yields a net loss [ST, II-II, 78.2, ad 5]. Secondly, I may charge an additional fee for money lent if lending causes me to suffer some loss that I would have otherwise avoided. For example, if my loan of $1000 to a friend in need prevents me from paying my rent and thus incurring a $100 late fee, I may justly demand $1100 in return to cover my losses [ST, II-II, 78.2, ad 1]). Again, Aquinas condemns usury because it exceeds the ius that justice requires to exist between individuals. The same injustice would exist if one were to take advantage of a buyer's desperation by selling a product for more than its value or to take advantage of a seller's desperation by buying something for less than its value (ST, II-II, 77.1). In either case someone falls short of or exceeds the ius of a given situation, which is inherently contrary the equality that justice requires.

5. The Limitations of Politics

As we have seen, much of Aquinas' political teaching is adapted from the Aristotelian political science which he studied in great detail and which he largely embraced. Perhaps the most central Aristotelian political doctrine in Aquinas' view is the inherent goodness and naturalness of political society. It is also necessary to understand, however, that in addition to being good and natural political society is also limited in several important respects, not all of which would have been pointed out by Aristotle but are unique to Aquinas' teaching. As we have already seen, Aquinas believes that the human laws governing political societies must be somewhat limited in scope. For example, the fact that something like the practice of usury is unjust does not necessarily mean that political society can or should forbid it: "Human laws leave certain things unpunished, on account of the condition of those who are imperfect, and who would be deprived of many advantages, if all sins were strictly forbidden and punishments appointed for them." (ST, II-II, 78.1 ad 3). In this argument, Aquinas is making the simple point that human law is incapable of regulating every dimension of social life. Perhaps he would elaborate that attempting to police the practice of usury may in some cases hinder a society's ability to prevent more serious crimes like murder, assault, and robbery (ST, I-II, 96.2). This is due to the limited nature of human law and political society itself and is one of the reasons why God has wisely chosen to apply his own divine law to human affairs. In addition to its infallibility and the fact that it applies to the "interior movements" of man's soul, divine law is able to punish all vices while demanding the moral perfection from humans that God expects (ST, I-II, 91.4). Human law, on the other hand, must often settle for preventing only those things that imperil the immediate safety of those protected by it. This is not to say that human law does not also look to promote virtue, but the virtues it succeeds in instilling seldom fulfill the full moral capabilities of human citizens.

Secondly, Aquinas' definition of natural law as the human participation in the eternal law also indicates something emphatically trans-political about human nature that cannot be found in the Aristotelian doctrine to which Aquinas largely adapted his own. Whereas Aristotle had argued for the existence of a natural standard of morality, he never suggested an overarching human community with a supreme lawgiver, and yet this is precisely what Aquinas' teaching explicitly affirms (ST, I-II, 91.1-2). Not only is the natural law a universally binding law for all humans in all places (something that Aristotle never recognized), it also points to the existence of a God that consciously and providently governs human affairs as a whole (also something absent from the Aristotelian teaching). Without such divine origins, the natural law would lose its legal character, since under Aquinas' own definition there can be no law that does not derive from someone who "has care of the community." (ST, I-II, 90.3-4) Hence the very existence of natural law implies a more universal community under God that transcends political society. This is also apparent by looking at the epistemological basis of Aquinas' natural law theory. As we have seen, human beings know the precepts of the natural law by a natural habit Aquinas calls synderesis. Whereas these precepts may be reinforced by the political community, they are first promulgated by nature itself and instilled in man's mind by the hand of God. They owe nothing, therefore, to political society for their content. This is considerably different from the Aristotelian doctrine that includes no teaching regarding the self-evident first principles of natural morality upon which Aquinas' natural law theory stands or falls and that seems to suggest (contrary to Aquinas' view) that no universally binding law even exists that is not somewhat subject to change from regime to regime (Nicomachean Ethics, 1134b33). This difference points out in a particularly striking way the un-Aristotelian character of Aquinas' insistence that all regimes, whether they realize it or not, are under God's supreme authority and owe the binding force of their laws to the more fundamental natural law of which God is the sole author.

Finally, political society as Aquinas understands it is limited in an even further sense. We may observe this by returning to Aquinas' claim that political society is natural. In one sense, of course, this affirmation of Aristotle's teaching constitutes a very high exaltation of the political. Only by living in political society is man capable of achieving his full natural potential. Thus understood politics is no mere instrumental good (as in the teachings of modern political thinkers such as Hobbes and Locke), but is part of the very fabric of the human person, and thus the individual's participation in political society is a great intrinsic good for the individual as well as for society. On the other hand, the characterization of politics as natural also means for Aquinas that it falls short of man's ultimate supernatural end. For this reason Aquinas never ceases to remind us that, although politics is natural to man and constitutes an important aspect of the natural law, "man is not ordained to the body politic according to all that he is and has." (ST, I-II, 21.4 ad 3). By this Aquinas means that beyond the fulfillment of the natural law, the active participation in political society, and even the exercise of the moral virtues, human beings find their complete perfection and happiness only in beatitude—the supernatural end to which they are called. Of course, beatitude is only fully completed in the afterlife (ST, I-II, 5.3), but even in his terrestrial existence man is called upon to exercise a supernatural perfection made possible through his active cooperation with God's grace. Precisely because it is a natural institution, political society is not equipped to guide human beings toward the attainment of this higher supernatural vocation. In this respect it must yield to the Church, which (unlike political society) is divinely established and primarily concerned with the distribution of divine grace and the salvation of souls (On Kingship, Book I, Chapters 14-15). Again, to say that political society is merely natural is not to suggest that it should only concern man's basic natural needs such as food, shelter, and safety. The common good that political authorities pursue includes the maintenance of a just society where individual citizens may flourish physically as well as morally. Politics thus promotes the natural virtues (most of all justice), which are themselves the human soul's preparation for the reception of divine grace and the infusion of the supernatural virtues of faith, hope, and, above all, charity. The best one can hope from political society is that citizens will be well disposed to receive the grace available to them through the Church, which transcends politics both in its universality as well as in the finality of its purpose.

6. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

i. Aquinas' Political Writings in English

  • Summa Contra Gentiles, vol. III. 1975. Trans. Vernon Bourke. Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press.
  • Summa Theologiae. 1981. Trans. Fathers of the English Dominican Province. Westminster: Christian Classics.
  • Commentary on Aristotle's Nicomachean Ethics. 1993. Trans. C. I. Litzinger, O. P. Notre Dame, IN: Dumb Ox Books.
  • Commentary on Aristotle's Politics. 1963. Trans. Ernest L. Fortin and Peter D. O'Neill. In Medieval Political Philosophy: A Sourcebook, eds. Ralph Lerner and Muhsin Mahdi. Toronto, ON: The Free Press of Glencoe.
  • Commentary on Aristotle's Politics. 2007. Trans. Richard Regan. Indianapolis, IN: Hackett Publishing.
  • On the Governance of Rulers. 1943. Trans. Gerald B. Phelan. London: Sheed and Ward Publishers.

ii. Two Useful Collections of Aquinas' Political Writings in English

  • On Law, Morality, and Politics. 2002. Trans. Richard Regan. Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing.
  • Aquinas: Political Writings. 2002. Trans. R.W. Dyson. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

b. Secondary Sources

i. Books

  • Oscar, Brown. 1981. Natural rectitude and divine law in Aquinas: an approach to an integral interpretation of the Thomistic Doctrine of Law. Toronto: Pontifical Institute of Mediaeval Studies.
  • Di Blasi, Fulvio. 2006. God and the Natural Law: A Rereading of Thomas Aquinas. South Bend, IN: St. Augustine's Press.
  • Finnis, John. 1998. Aquinas: Moral, Political and Legal Theory. Oxford University Press.
  • Gilby, Thomas. 1958. The Political Thought of Thomas Aquinas. Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Hall, Pamela M. 1994. Narrative and the Natural Law: An Interpretation of Thomistic Ethics. Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press.
  • Kempsall, M.S. 1999. The Common Good in Late Medieval Political Thought. Oxford University Press.
  • Keys, Mary M. 2006. Aquinas, Aristotle, and the Promise of the Common Good. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Malloy, Michael P. 1985. Civil Authority in Medieval Philosophy: Lombard, Aquinas, and Bonaventure. Lanham: University Press of America.
  • Maritain, Jacques. 1951. Man and the State. Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Maritain, Jacques. 1947. The Person and the Common Good. New York: Scribner's.
  • Maritain, Jacques. 2001. Natural Law Reflections of Theory and Practice. St. Augustine's Press.
  • McInerny, Ralph. 1997. Ethica Thomistica: The Moral Philosophy of Thomas Aquinas, Washington DC: Catholic University of America Press.
  • McInerny, Ralph. 1992. Aquinas on Human Action: A Theory of Practice. Washington DC: Catholic University of America Press.
  • Nemeth, Charles. 2001. Aquinas in the Courtroom: Lawyers, Judges, and Judicial Conduct.Westport, CT: Praeger Publishers.
  • Porter, Jean. 2004. Nature As Reason: A Thomistic Theory Of The Natural Law. Wm. B. Eerdmans Publishing Company.
  • Simon, Yves. 1993. Philosophy of Democratic Government. University of Notre Dame Press.
  • Simon, Yves. 1992. The Tradition of Natural Law: A Philosopher's Reflections. Fordham University Press, 1992.
  • Simon, Yves. 1980. A General Theory of Authority. University of Notre Dame Press.

ii. Articles and Chapters

  • Bleakley, Holly Hamilton. 1999. "The Art of Ruling in Aquinas' De Regimine Principum," History of Political Thought 20: 575-602.
  • Blythe, James. 1986. "The Mixed Constitution and the Distinction between Regal and Political Power in the Work of Thomas Aquinas," Journal of the History of Ideas 47: 547-565.
  • Brown, Montague. 2004. "Religion, Politics and the Natural Law: Thomas Aquinas on Our Obligations to Others," Skepsis 15: 316-330.
  • Brown, Oscar. 1979. "Aquinas' Doctrine of Slavery in Relation to Thomistic Teaching on Natural Law,"Proceedings of the American Catholic Philosophical Association 53: 173-181.
  • Crofts, Richard. 1973. "The Common Good in the Political Theory of Thomas Aquinas," Thomist 37: 155-173.
  • Degnan, Daniel. 1982. "Two Models of Positive Law in Aquinas: A Study of the Relationship of Positive and Natural Law," Thomist 46: 1-32.
  • Dewan, Lawrence, O.P. 2002. "Jean Porter on Natural Law: Thomistic Notes," Thomist 66 (2): 275-309.
  • Dewan, Lawrence, O.P. 2000. "St. Thomas, John Finnis, and the Political Good," Thomist 64 (3): 337-374.
  • Dewan, Lawrence, O.P. 1996. "Natural Law and the First Act of Freedom: Maritain Revisited" Maritain Studies 12: 3-32.
  • Eschmann, I.T. 1958. "St. Thomas Aquinas on the Two Powers," Mediaeval Studies 20: 177-205.
  • Eschmann, I.T. 1946, "Studies on the Notion of Society in St. Thomas Aquinas, Part I" Mediaeval Studies 8: 1-42.
  • Eschmann, I.T. 1943. "A Thomistic Glossary on the Principle of the Preeminence of a Common Good,"Mediaeval Studies 5: 123-166.
  • Finnis, John. 2001. "Natural Law, God, Religion, and Human Fulfillment," American Journal of Jurisprudence, 46: 3-36.
  • Finnis, John. 1998. "Public Good: The Specifically Political Common Good in Aquinas" in Natural Law and Moral Inquiry: Ethics, Metaphysics, and Politics in the Work of Germain Grisez, ed., Robert George, (Washington DC: Georgetown University Press) 174-209.
  • Finnis, John. 1987. "Natural Law and Natural Inclinations: Some Comments and Clarifications," New Scholasticism 61: 307-20.
  • Finnis, John. 1981. "The Basic Principles of Natural Law: A Reply to Ralph McInerny," American Journal of Jurisprudence 26: 21-31.
  • Foley, Michael. 2004. "Thomas Aquinas' Novel Modesty," History of Political Thought 25: 402-423.
  • Fortin, Ernest. 1987. "Thomas Aquinas" In The History of Political Philosophy, eds. Leo Strauss and Joseph Cropsey. University of Chicago Press, 248-275.
  • Froelich, Gregory. 1993. "Ultimate End and Common Good," Thomist 57 (4): 609-619.
  • Froelich, Gregory. 1989. "The Equivocal Status of the Common Good," New Scholasticism 63: 38-57.
  • Gelinas, E.T. 1971. "Right and Law in Aquinas," Proceedings of the American Catholic Philosophical Association 45: 130-138.
  • Grisez, Germain. 1965. "The First Principle of Practical Reason: A Commentary on the Summa Theologiae, 1-2, Question 94, Article 2", Natural Law Forum 10: 168-201.
  • Henle, R.J. 1990. "Sanction and the Law According to St. Thomas Aquinas," Vera Lex 5-6.
  • Kreyche, Robert. 1974. "Virtue and Law in Aquinas: Some Modern Implications," Southwestern Journal of Philosophy 5: 111-140.
  • Koritansky, Peter. 2005. "Two Theories of Retributive Punishment: Immanuel Kant and Thomas Aquinas," History of Philosophy Quarterly 22 (4) 319-338.
  • Kries, Douglas. 1990. "Thomas Aquinas and the Politics of Moses," Review of Politics 52: 1-21.
  • Lee, Patrick. 1997. "Is Thomas' Natural Law Theory Naturalist?" American Catholic Philosophical Quarterly 71: 567-587.
  • Lee, Patrick. 1982. "Aquinas and Scotus on Liberty and Natural Law," Proceedings of the American Catholic Philosophical Association 56: 70-78.
  • Lustig, Andrew. 1991. "Natural Law, Property, and Justice: The General Justification of Property in Aquinas and Locke," Journal of Religious Ethics 19: 119-149.
  • Lutz-Bachman, Matthias. 2000. "The Discovery of a Normative Theory of Justice in Medieval Philosophy: On the Reception and Further Development of Aristotle's Theory of Justice by St. Thomas Aquinas," Medieval Philosophy and Theology 9: 1-14.
  • McInerny, Ralph. 1980. "The Principles of Natural Law," American Journal of Jurisprudence 25: 1-15.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. 1996. "Natural Law as Subversive: the Case of Aquinas," Journal of Medieval and Early Modern Studies 26: 61-83.
  • Osborne, Thomas. 2000. "Dominium regale et politicum: Sir John Fortescue's Response to the Problem of Tyranny As Presented by Thomas Aquinas and Ptolemy of Lucca," Medieval Studies 62: 161-187.
  • Pakaluk, Michael. 2001. "Is the Common Good of Political Society Limited and Instrumental?" Review of Metaphysics 55: 57-94.
  • Pope, Stephen. 1991. "Aquinas on Almsgiving, Justice and Charity: An Interpretation and Reassessment,"Heythrop Journal 32: 167-191.
  • Porter, Jean. 1989. "De Ordine Caritatis: Charity, Friendship and Justice in Thomas Aquinas' Summa Theologiae," Thomist 53: 197-213.
  • Regan, Richard. 1986. "The Human Person and Organized Society: Aquinas." In The Moral Dimensions of Politics: New York: Oxford University Press: 37-46.
  • Regan, Richard. 1981. "Aquinas on Political Obedience and Disobedience," in Thought 56: 77-88.
  • Rosario, Tomas. 2004. "St. Thomas on Rebellion," Philosophia 33: 72-85.
  • Ross, James. 1974. "Justice is Reasonableness: Aquinas on Human Law and Morality," Monist 58: 86-103.
  • Rowntree, Stephen. 2004. "Aquinas' Economic Ethics "Profoundly Anticapitalistic?" Vera Lex 5 (1-2): 91-111.
  • Schall, James. 1998. "On the Most Mysterious of the Virtues: The Political and Philosophical Meaning of Obedience in St. Thomas, Rousseau, and Yves Simon," Gregorianum 79 (4): 743-758.
  • Schall, James. 1957. "The Totality of Society: From Justice to Friendship" Thomist 20: 1-26.
  • Schols, Sally. 1996. "Civil Disobedience in the Social Theory of Thomas Aquinas," Thomist 60: 449-462.
  • Scully, Edgar. 1981. "The Place of the State in Society according to Aquinas," Thomist 45: 407-429.
  • Seebohm, Thomas. 1986, "Isidore of Seville versus Aristotle in the Questions on Human Law and Right in the Summa Theologiae of Thomas Aquinas," Graduate Faculty Philosophy Journal 11: 83-105.
  • Sigmund, Paul. 1993. "Law and Politics" in The Cambridge Companion to Aquinas, ed. Kretzmann, Norman (New York: Cambridge University Press).
  • Stump, Eleonore. 1998. "Aquinas on Justice" Proceedings of the American Catholic Philosophical Association 71: 61-78.
  • Weithman, Paul. 1998. "Complimentarity and Equality in the Political Thought of Thomas Aquinas,"Theological Studies 59 (No. 2): 277-296.
  • Weithman, Paul. 1992. "Augustine and Aquinas on Original Sin and the Function of Political Authority,"Journal of the History of Philosophy 30: 353-376.
  • Weithman, Paul. 1990. "St. Thomas on the Motives of Unjust Acts," Proceedings of the American Catholic Philosophical Association 63: 204-220.

Author Information

Peter Koritansky
The University of Prince Edward Island

Peter Abelard (1079—1142)

abelardPeter Abelard (1079-1142) was the preeminent philosopher of the twelfth century and perhaps the greatest logician of the middle ages. During his life he was equally famous as a poet and a composer, and might also have ranked as the preeminent theologian of his day had his ideas earned more converts and less condemnation. In all areas Abelard was brilliant, innovative, and controversial. He was a genius. He knew it, and made no apologies. His vast knowledge, wit, charm, and even arrogance drew a generation of Europe's finest minds to Paris to learn from him.

Philosophically, Abelard is best known as the father of nominalism. For contemporary philosophers, nominalism is most closely associated with the problem of universals but is actually a much broader metaphysical system. Abelard formulated what is now recognized as a central nominalist tenet: only particulars exist. However, his solution to the problem of universals is a semantic account of the meaning and proper use of universal words. It is from Abelard's claim that only words (nomen) are universal that nominalism gets its name. Abelard would have considered himself first a logician and then later in his life a theologian and ethicist. He may well have been the best logician produced in the Middle Ages. Several innovations and theories that are conventionally thought to have originated centuries later can be found in his works. Among these are a theory of direct reference for nouns, an account of purely formal validity, and a theory of propositional content once thought to have originated with Gottlob Frege. In ethics, Abelard develops a theory of moral responsibility based on the agent's intentions. Moral goodness is defined as intending to show love of God and neighbor and being correct in that intention.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Works
  2. Universals
  3. Metaphysics
  4. Logic and Philosophy of Language
  5. Cognition and Philosophy of Mind
  6. Ethics
  7. References and Further Reading
    1. General Surveys
    2. Life
    3. Universals
    4. Logic, Metaphysics, and Philosophy of Mind
    5. Ethics
    6. William of Champeaux

1. Life and Works

Peter Abelard was born the eldest son of lesser nobility in La Pallet in Brittany. In 1092, around the age of 13, Abelard gave up his inheritance and knighthood and began an extraordinary philosophical education with the greatest philosophical and theological minds of his day: Roscelin of Compiegne (from 1092-1099), William of Champeaux (from 1100-1102 and 1108-1110), and Anselm of Laon (in 1113). Although each of these men was at the peak of his intellectual reputation, Abelard quickly became disenchanted with them all. He moved first from Roscelin to William and then, believing he could do better, set up his first school at Melun in 1102. He ran this school successfully for two years until he was forced to return to Brittany. He claims this was due to ill health. Recent biographers have speculated that it had more to do with political turmoil involving his patron Stephen de Garlande. In 1108 he returned to Paris to study again with William. Conflict was probably inevitable between the established scholar who held the reputation for being the leading intellectual in Paris and the young genius who felt he deserved an even greater crown. Between 1108 and 1110 Abelard and William had their famous disputes over the nature of universals. Abelard claims to have driven William from the schools of Paris in shame. In fact, William left Paris to become a Bishop of Châlon-sur-Marne and Papal ambassador to the court of Emperor Henry V. This is perhaps not as shameful as Abelard suggests, but William's views on universals have never since been seriously held by another philosopher.

Abelard continued to teach successfully until 1113 when he left to study theology with Anselm of Laon. Abelard was equally disenchanted by Anselm, but not quite so lucky in this dispute. Abelard set himself up as a competing lecturer. He attracted many of Anselm's students to himself, but earned the enduring enmity of others. Anselm's aggrieved disciples dogged Abelard his entire career. They quickly acquired St. Bernard of Clairvaux as their champion. Bernard needed little convincing. He took offence at Abelard's attempt to apply the tools of logic and dialectic to questions Bernard felt were properly mystical and spiritual. Twice Bernard orchestrated councils where Abelard's works were condemned. At Soissons (1122) Abelard was forced to ceremonially burn his own book the Theologia Summi Boni. At Sens (1140) a revised version, the Theologia Scholarium, was again condemned and Abelard and his followers were excommunicated.

These condemnations were in the future when Abelard returned to Paris in 1113 to take up the chair at Notre Dame that had been vacated by William of Champeaux. Once again Abelard taught successfully, for a few years. In 1116 or thereabouts Abelard began an affair with Heloise his student and the niece of Fulbert the canon of Notre Dame. She was to become one of the great minds of the twelfth century in her own right, and theirs is the great tragic love story of the middle ages. They fell in love, had a child, secretly married, and exchanged a series of love letters that have become the stuff of legend. Unfortunately, they kept their marriage a secret from Fulbert. Heloise's uncle exercised the traditional right of aggrieved families in such cases and had Abelard castrated.

For the next ten years, Abelard undertook an unsuccessful career as a monk. Because of his reputation many monasteries wanted to claim him as their own. Because of his personality this rarely worked out well. He left St. Denis after "proving" that the monastery's founder (also the patron saint of France) could not be the St. Denis that they claimed but rather was a different and less significant St. Denis. In 1126 he was appointed abbot of St. Gildas. He had been elected by the brothers based on his flamboyant reputation. They were bitterly disappointed to get in Abelard a strident reformer of monastic discipline. Abelard claims that the monks tried to kill him.

Abelard returned to Paris for the last time in 1133 where he taught and wrote until the council of Sens in 1141. St. Bernard had diligently worked behind the scenes to ensure that Abelard and his works would be condemned. Recognizing that the council was not a forum to debate ideas but rather a panel assembled to confirm a pre-established conclusion, Abelard was famously silent when questioned. He appealed the decision directly to the Pope in Rome. Once again Bernard's superior connections and diplomatic skills won out. Before Abelard could even leave France, Bernard had already orchestrated a pronouncement from the Pope upholding the council's decision. The Pope lifted the excommunication, but Abelard was condemned to silence. Abelard lived out his days under the protection of Peter the Venerable Abbot of Cluny. He died on April 21, 1142 and was buried at the Paraclete, the abbey he had founded with Heloise. Today Abelard and Heloise's bodies are interred at Père Lachaise cemetery in Paris.

Abelard's best known writings are his autobiography the Historia Calamitatum (The Story of my Misfourtunes), the letters he exchanged with Heloise, and the Sic et Non. The Historia, written after Abelard's escape from St. Gildas, details Abelard's rise to fame and the misfortunes of his fall. It is addressed to an unidentified friend with the hope that this friend will feel better about his own suffering after reading of Abelard's. The real purpose was likely to remind people of Abelard's past fame and to pave the way for a return to Paris. The letters of Abelard and Heloise discuss issues ranging from their relationship to theological and philosophical matters affecting Heloise's nuns at the Paraclete. In the past century there was considerable debate about the authenticity of these letters, or at least about Heloise's letters. It is now generally accepted that the letters are authentic, and that Heloise was as formidable a personality in real life as she appears in her letters. The Sic et Non does not strictly speaking contain any of Abelard's original thought. Rather, Abelard collected a list of 158 controversial theological questions and compiled writings from authorities some for ("Sic"), some opposed ("Non"). The reader should be able to dissolve the apparent conflict between authorities and come to understand the answers to the questions posed through rational discussion.

Abelard's works in logic and metaphysics were written mostly in those periods he was teaching in and around Paris. The result is Abelard's earliest work, is a series of glosses called the Introductiones Parvulorum (ca. 1100-1104). These are almost line by line explanations of the standard logical texts available in the Latin West: Porphyry's Isagoge, Boethius' De hypotheticis syllogismis and De topicis differentiis, and Aristotle's Categories and De interpretatione. These close textual commentaries show how much Abelard's early thought was influenced by his first teacher Roscelin. Abelard explains these texts—even the Categories—as being about words and language not things in the world. In his second stint teaching in Paris, Abelard wrote another series of commentaries on the same works, the Logica Ingredientibus, and a treatise in logic, the Dialectica (ca. 1115-1119). These works are much more expansive. It is here that Abelard develops his distinctive form of nominalism, and develops his most influential thoughts in logic. The switch from Roscelin's vocalism, a theory of words, to his own nominalism, a theory of names, reflects a more sophisticated understanding of semantics and metaphysics developed while disputing with William. The Logica Nostrorum Petitioni Sociorum, a later commentary on Porphyry perhaps from his third stint in Paris, contains a restatement and perhaps several subtle changes in his theory of universals.

In his final period of teaching in the 1130s, Abelard turned primarily to ethics and theology. His lectures on logic were well attended but John of Salisbury suggests that late in his career Abelard was no longer on the cutting edge. Abelard's two major ethical works—the Ethics or Know yourself and the Dialogue Between a Philosopher, a Jew, and a Christian (or Colationes)—were both written in the late 1130's.

Over the course of his career Abelard wrote three distinct treatises on the Trinity. The sequence and progression of Abelard's Trinitarian thought is better known than some other aspects of Abelard's thought. The Theologia Summi Boni was condemned at the council of Soissons (1122). The Theologia Christiana (ca 1125-30) remains the most influential of the three. This is because the third the Theologia Scholarium was itself condemned at the counsel of Sens (1141), where Abelard and his followers were excommunicated. In addition to these extensive works on the Trinity, Abelard wrote several commentaries on books of the bible, soliloquies, ethical and religious poems, and studies of the various creeds.

2. Universals

Abelard is credited as the founder of nominalism for his claim that a universal is a name (nomen) or significant word (sermo). He is also credited with inspiring a school of followers called the nominales. His discussion of universals has two parts: a rejection of realism and a semantic solution to the problem of universals. In its simplest form, the problem of universals is the problem of explaining how two or more individuals are the same (or similar). Plato and Socrates are both human beings yet they are distinct individuals. A realist posits some item in the world, namely, "humanity"—a universal that is somehow shared by both Plato and Socrates. This shared universal makes both Socrates and Plato human and is the reason the word "human" applies equally to both. Abelard denies the existence of any such universal item in this realist sense. His solution to the problem of universals is a semantic account of how universal words apply to many discrete individuals when there is no universal shared by those individuals.

For the first part of his argument, Abelard generally finds it sufficient to refute particular realist arguments. The three most prominent in Abelard's writings are (1) material essence realism and (2) indifference realism—both held by William of Champeaux—and (3) collective realism.

Material essence realism has three central theses:

(1) there are ten most general essences, one corresponding to each of Aristotle's ten categories. These ten most general essences exist in some degree unformed.

(2) these general essences are the "matter" that is formed into sub-altern genera and species by the addition of differentia, the characteristic features that determine the species to which each type of substance belongs. The most general essence, Substance, is formed into Corporeal Substance and Incorporeal Substance by the addition of the differentiae Corporeal and Incorporeal, and so on down the tree of porphyry

(3) individuation is accomplished by the addition of accidental forms. At the species level—when substance has been differentiated into Rational, Mortal, Animate, Corporeal, Substance (Human)—the addition of accidental forms divides the material essence into discrete individuals. Socrates and Plato share exactly the same material essence of Humanity. But Plato is tall and has brown hair. Socrates is short and bald. These accidental properties make them individuals.

The individuals in a species or genus share the single material essence. This pure universal essence is never actually found in the world, but William claims "it does not go against nature for it to be a pure thing if it were to happen that all its accidents were removed." (Marenbon 2004: 33) This exercise of stripping away the accidental forms of Socrates to arrive at pure humanity is not merely a mental exercise; it could possibly occur thereby revealing the underlying pure universal essence.

It is this principle of a single universal substance individuated by accidents that Abelard reduces to absurdity. Material essence realism makes individuation itself impossible. The accidents that are supposed to individuate substance are themselves un-individuated universal essences. The material essences in the categories of quality and quantity etc. also must be individuated by the addition of an accidental form. An accident cannot individuate substance unless that accident has been individuated first. Abelard writes "The <accidental> forms in themselves are not in essence diverse from one another.... Therefore, Socrates and Plato are no more diverse from one another because of the nature of quality than they are because of the nature of substance." (Spade, 1994: §37) Material essence realism cannot explain the existence of discrete individuals.

In response, William formulates a second realist theory of universals. Indifference realism rejects the core principle of material essence realism: shared essences. William now accepted that it is simply a basic fact about individuals that they are completely discrete from one another. The seed of the theory is found in an ambiguity in the words "one" and "same." William claims that, "When I say Plato and Socrates are the same I might attribute identity of wholly the same essence or I might simply mean that they do not differ in some relevant respect." The stronger sense of "one" and "same" applies to Peter/ Simon, Saul/ Paul (we would say Cicero/Tully). As for Plato and Socrates:

We say that they are the same in that they are men, "same" pertaining with regard to humanity. Just as one is rational so is the other, just as one is mortal so is the other. But if we wanted to make a true confession it is not the same humanity in each one, but similar humanity since they are two men. (Sententiae 236.115-120)

So although Plato and Socrates have no common matter they are still called "same" because they do not differ. This leads to the claim that Abelard finds so disturbing: each individual is both universal and particular. William writes:

One Man is many men, taken particularly. Those which are one considered in a species are many considered particularly. That is to say, without accidents they are considered one per indifference, with accidents many (Iwakuma 1999 p.119).

Indifference realism is not a complete departure from material essence realism. When the accidents are stripped away, Plato and Socrates are still the same although in a weaker sense of "same." They do not share a material essence, nonetheless they do not differ. William's indifference realism holds that when the individuating accidents are stripped away from two individuals what you are left with may be numerically distinct but not discernable individuals. There are two of them but you cannot tell them apart or tell which one was Plato. What you are left with are pure things—there are no individuating characteristics. Each individual is itself the universal.

In his own works, Abelard did not explain indifference realism in any detail. He notes that this view is closer to the truth but he does not explain how or why. He rejects the view based on the metaphysical absurdity of the individual being the universal. On William's second view Socrates is the species "humanity." If Socrates, insofar as he is humanity, is the universal, then it is in fact Socrates that is predicated of Plato when we say "Plato is human." Conversely if the species "humanity" is the individual then it cannot be a universal. By definition an individual cannot be predicated of many. To the more basic claim that Plato and Socrates are the same in that they do not differ in being man, Abelard responds that they are also the same in that they do not differ in being stone. Pointing out that things do not differ does not explain their similarity, agreement, or sameness.

The third prominent realist theory Abelard refutes is collective realism. This is the view that the entire collection of individuals contained in a species constitutes the universal. For example, the entire collection of humans would constitute the universal "Humanity." The entire collection of animals is the universal "Animal." And so forth. Abelard's attack on this view is equally devastating. The central idea in his best arguments is that being an individual of a certain species or genus is metaphysically prior to inclusion in the collection. If there is a prior reason for placing an individual in one collection and not another—if there is a right and a wrong way to put individuals into species—then the collection is not doing the work of the universal. The collection is not defining genera and species, it is reflecting genera and species. If there is no such principle, then any collection of random items could be a genus and any subset of that collection would be a species. Two men, one squirrel and paper cup could be a universal. Collective realism either fails to explain what it purports to explain or adopts such radical conventionalism about ontology that it is reduced to absurdity. Abelard's refutation of William's realism revealed his (Abelard's) commitment to a world populated by discrete individuals. And his refutation of collective realism reveals a belief that individuals fall into natural kinds.

The refutation of prominent realist theories leaves Abelard free to pursue the second part of his argument. Having shown that there are no universal things, he can now develop a semantic theory of universals. In his Logica Ingredientibus, Abelard approaches the subject by posing three distinct questions: What is the common cause for the imposition of universal words? What is the common conception signified by universal words? Are universal words universal because of the common cause, the common conception, or both?

The common cause for the imposition of universal words is the status. The person who imposed the universal word "human" established the convention whereby the word's corresponding sound names each individual that has the status: being a human. In contemporary terms, Abelard holds a theory of direct reference. The universal word refers to—or nominates—each individual with the status even when speakers do not have a clear understanding of the status involved. The status itself is not an item in Abelard's ontology. That is, it is not matter, form, or essence; it is not a part of the individual. Each individual human can be said to have the status: being a human. But equally a horse and an ass are alike in the status: not being human. Not being human is clearly not some thing shared by a horse and an ass. The status or states of being human or of not being human are basic features of the individual itself. Each human just is a human. Each horse is just not a human. It is a basic fact about individuals that each falls into a niche on the tree of Porphyry, each is of a particular kind. This is because of the way individuals are created. According to Abelard, God conceives an exemplar or model in his mind before he makes individuals. An individual's being human is the result of an individual's being made according to the exemplar for human beings. Analogously, a house's being a ranch results from its being built according to certain blueprints. Being human and being a ranch are not metaphysical items distinct from the individual. It is a basic fact about individuals that each one is made according to an exemplar in the divine mind.

The common conception is the understanding signified by the universal word. The utterance of the word "human" generates an understanding in the mind of the hearer. This common conception or common understanding is the meaning of the word. In successful communication, the speaker has an act of understanding that pertains to all and only things with the status being a human (as described below). He utters the word "human" and thereby causes his hearer to have his own act of understanding that pertains to all and only things that have the status being a human. The understanding generated in the mind of the hearer pertains to the same things as the speaker's understanding when uttering the word. These understandings are formed through a process of abstraction. From studying individual humans and honing the understanding of them, we form an understanding that pertains to each individual with a status but to no individual uniquely. The process of abstraction produces understandings that are alone (sola), bare (nuda), and pure (pura). Alone means apart from sense; we do not understand the individual as a present object of sensation. A bare understanding abstracts away some of the forms in the individual. An understanding that is alone and bare conceives of this-humanity, this-whiteness, etc. An alone and bare understanding is not yet a universal understanding. A universal understanding must be pure: it must abstract from all individuating conditions. The universal understanding generated by the word "human" conceives of just the nature, mortal rational animal, and nothing else. It pertains to all individual humans but only insofar as each is human. The understanding contains nothing by which one individual could be picked out over any other. These alone, bare, and pure understandings can approximate the exemplars in the divine mind sufficiently for the imposition and use of language. However, because we must learn by studying the created individuals our human understandings will always fall short of knowledge. We will never understand natures and properties as well as the creator.

The primacy of the individual is the central element in Abelard's theory. Unless and until individuals with a particular status are created, we cannot form an understanding of their nature or impose a word to name them. This limitation is not an accident of our imperfect epistemic position. In a way that Abelard finds disturbing, the same holds for God.

But a question now arises about the builder's (God's) plan: Is it empty 'false or meaningless' while he now holds in mind the form of the future work, then the thing is not that way yet?... If someone calls it "empty" on the grounds that it would not yet be in harmony with the status of the future thing, we shudder at the awful words, but do not reject the judgment. For it is true that the future status of the world did not materially exist while God was intelligibly arranging what was still future. (Spade, 1994: §135)

Before he creates roses even God's alone, bare, and pure understanding of the nature rose is empty. Presumably, were God to attempt to use the word "rose" under these conditions his word would not name any thing, and no one would know what he was talking about.

Discussion of the problem of universals in the early middle ages was framed by Porphyry's three questions: (a) whether genera and species are real or are situated in bare thoughts alone, (b) whether as real they are bodies or incorporeals, and (c) whether they are separated or in sensibles and have their reality in connection with them. These questions had clearly been formulated with a realist answer in mind. After some not too subtle spin in answering Porphyry's questions Abelard adds a fourth.

Do 'universals' so long as they are 'universals' necessarily have some thing subject to them by nomination? Or alternatively, even if the things named are destroyed, can the universal consist even then in the signification of the understanding alone? For example, the name "rose" when there are no roses to which it is common. (Spade 1994: §10)

Abelard's answer is "no." When there are no roses then the word "rose" is no longer a universal word; it no longer names (or nominates) many discrete individuals. The word "rose", when uttered, would still generate an understanding which would pertain to all roses were the roses to return. When all the roses are gone the sentence "There are no roses" would be both meaningful and true. The understanding, although preserving the meaning of the universal term, is not the universal. When the individuals are destroyed the word is no longer universal.

3. Metaphysics

The fundamental commitment behind Abelard's nominalism, that there is nothing that is not individual (or at least particular), is the conceptual core of all his metaphysical thought. Abelard held that the individual is primary, ontologically basic, and requires no explanation. It is notoriously difficult to prove such a claim. If Abelard could be said to have a metaphysical project it would be to show that other "items" that more promiscuous philosophers would add to their ontology can be reductively explained in terms of individuals (or at least of particulars).

Abelard asserts that individuals are integral wholes, and he adopts the language of form-matter composites to describe individuals, but the form is nothing other than the arrangement of the parts that comprise the whole. (cf. LI cat 79ff) Abelard holds a doctrine of double creation. God first created the four basic elements and then combined the four basic elements into various individuals according to the exemplars in his mind (LI cat 298ff; D 419ff). Only God has this power to assemble parts into a single discrete individual substance. Only God can impose form on matter (D 419). It makes perfect sense for Abelard to talk about forms, but the form is not a part of the individual. This is the hallmark of Abelard's reductivism; "form" is a name for an objectively discernable feature of the individual, not for an ontologically distinct item.

Individuals thus created are discreet from all others; they share no matter or form, yet they are similar. Abelard will explain this in terms of natures or substantial forms, but again prefers a reductive account. Individuals have a certain nature because they have a certain substantial form, but this substantial form is not a part of the individual or any item that could be shared by two individuals. In contemporary terms Abelard would be a resemblance nominalist. Individuals created by God according to the same exemplar will be naturally similar in the way that houses made according to the same blueprint are similar. This similarity is real, not conventional, but nothing in addition to the individuals is required to explain this fact. The individuals that populate the world fall into natural kinds. Natures themselves do not need to be posited to explain this fact about the world.

Abelard provides many similar reductive accounts. Time reduces to nothing other than the individuals whose duration is measured. Relations are nothing more than the properties of the discreet individuals involved. Abelard's reductive accounts can be quite convoluted but the basic metaphysical commitment is consistent. His most difficult case is with the dictum asserted by a declarative sentence. He could not find a way to reduce false dicta and counterfactual dicta to extant individuals, but he asserts repeatedly that dicta are "wholly nothing" and "no essence at all."

4. Logic and Philosophy of Language

In the introductions and preambles to his various works, Abelard writes that a student should proceed from the study of words to the study of propositions—all with the goal of learning about argument. In addition to the semantic theories described above, Abelard developed a theory of propositional content thought to have originated with Frege; a theory of formal validity for syllogisms; and an as yet not well understood theory of true conditionals that differs from the account of syllogisms.

The study of words begins with the initial imposition of words. As new items are encountered, the creator of the language imposes a conventional sound to name that thing, or some nature or property of that thing. The word refers to the item directly by naming or nominating it. Naming directly picks out the item even if the imposer does not fully understand the individual, nature, or property named or even if he or she does not think about it completely correctly. In fact, Abelard writes that the imposer and subsequent users of the word may be completely ignorant of how to correctly understand the nature or property by virtue of which individuals are named by the word—as is the case with the word "stone"—and yet successfully name the individual or individuals the word was imposed to name.

Abelard assigns two related forms of signification to words: the signification of understandings and the signification of things. These two significations provide the meaning or content of the words. A spoken word signifies an understanding by generating an act of understanding in the mind of some hearer. This understanding generated should be the same as the understanding in the mind of the speaker, that is, both the speaker's and hearer's understanding of the same individual, nature, or property should correspond. The word is said to signify the thing that is the object of the act of understanding. Abelard is quite clear and explicit in arguing that the word does not signify a mental image or a concept. The spoken word causes the hearer to have an act of understanding—to think about—the individual, nature, or property that the speaker used the word to name. (The understanding of a nature or property pertains to all individuals with the nature or property and so is of individuals but not of any one individual uniquely.)

Abelard's discussion of words is undertaken with an eye towards sentences. The sentence is a combination of words and so what is signified by the sentence is, in a qualified sense, composed of what is signified by the words. Abelard will call the understanding generated by a sentence "composite" but this means only that the hearer's understanding is assembled piece by piece as he hears the words of the sentence. The "thing" signified by the sentence however is not composed of the things signified by the individual words. Rather, a declarative sentence signifies what is asserted to be the case. This is not a state of affairs nor is it a proposition if the latter is thought of as some item in the ontology. Abelard calls this the dictum; the declarative sentence "Socrates sits" signifies as its dictum that Socrates sits. The sentence is true or false if what it asserts to be the case actually is the case.

A declarative sentence signifies its dictum by asserting it, but not all sentences are declarative. With a slight change in intonation the sentence "Socrates sits" can be uttered as a question. The propositional content of the declarative sentence and the question are the same. Uttered as a declarative sentence, it is asserted that Socrates sits; a dictum is signified, and the sentence is either true or false. Uttered as a question, the propositional content is the same but there is no assertion that Socrates sits. There is no dictum. Abelard discusses the many different attitudes that can be taken with regard to the same propositional content and develops these ideas into a theory of propositional logic. He treats conditional sentences as assertions of the relation between the propositional content of the antecedent and consequent and not as an assertion of the truth of either. He also develops a theory of propositional negation which defines the negation of "All As are Bs" as "it is not the case that All As are Bs." This negation extinguishes the propositional content and has no existential import. (Traditional Aristotelian negation held that the negation of "All As are Bs" is "Some As are not Bs.")

There are several insights and innovations in Abelard's discussion of argument, inference, and entailments. However, there is also some tension between different texts and not all Abelard's views are well understood yet. Most worthy of note is Abelard's distinction between perfect and imperfect entailment.

A perfect entailment—syllogism or conditional—is valid by virtue of its form. Abelard held that the canonical moods of syllogisms—and their conditionalizations—were formally valid and did not need a topic or maximal proposition to warrant the inference. Abelard's criterion for perfect entailment is universal substitution, another insight that was thought to have originated centuries later. The syllogism

  1. All As are Bs
  2. All Bs are CsTherefore:
  3. All As are Cs

is valid for any terms substituted for A, B, and C. Nothing other than the formal logical structure is needed to warrant the entailment.

Imperfect entailments require more to warrant the inference. Here Abelard draws a further distinction between syllogisms and conditionals. The criterion for the validity of an imperfect syllogism is that it is impossible for the premises to be true and the conclusion false. However Abelard allows non-formal facts about the world (de natura rerum) to warrant the necessity of the syllogistic inference. These facts about the world are codified as topics and maximal propositions. A maximal proposition; for example, "whatever is predicated of the species is predicated of the genus" not only warrants an inference by stipulating a non-formal fact about the world, it limits the range of acceptable substitution to those terms signifying genera and their species. The necessity of a valid imperfect syllogism is found not in logic but in physics.

Abelard has a stricter criterion for conditionals. In contemporary terms, Abelard denied the deduction theorem. It is not enough that it be impossible for the antecedent to be true and the consequent false at the same time. This relationship might be accidental. For a conditional to be true it must also be the case that the understanding signified by the antecedent "contain" the understanding of the consequent. An example of a true conditional Abelard gives is, "If something is a body, it is corporeal." Corporeality is contained in the understanding signified by the term "body" and so this conditional is true. However, "If something is a body, it is colored" is false. It is a fact about the world that every body is some color or other, but "being colored" is not contained in the understanding of body. So, while the enthymeme, "X is a body therefore X is colored" is valid, the corresponding conditional is false. His student, John of Salisbury, expressed shock that Abelard would accept some syllogisms as valid but reject their corresponding conditionals as false.

5. Cognition and Philosophy of Mind

While Abelard's theory of mind and cognition was a foundation for his theories of universals and philosophy of language, he was not overly interested in philosophy of mind as such. His discussions of universals and signification each include a brief account of cognition. He wrote a stand-alone Treatise on Understandings with the express purpose of clarifying issues essential to his semantic theories.

Abelard considered his philosophy of mind to have been Aristotelian, but his knowledge of Aristotle on this subject was quite thin. He repeatedly echoes stock Aristotelian claims—sensation is of and through bodies, and so forth—but also rejects many core Aristotelian claims. Without recognizing it, Abelard rejects the accounts of cognition that can be found in Aristotle, most notably the accounts in De Anima and de Interpretatione. Abelard thoroughly rejects the theory (found in Aristotle's theory in De Anima) that cognition involves the formal identity between the mind and the object understood. He argues that it would be absurd to claim that the mind becomes four sided when it thinks of a four sided tower. He also points out that one can think of several things at once while nothing could have those contrary forms at the same time. These criticisms suggest that Abelard was completely unaware of Aristotle's account of intelligible forms. Given his own conception of form, this Aristotelian account of mind is nonsense.

Abelard also denies the view (expressed by Aristotle's in the de Interpretatione) that cognition is the formation of representations, images or likenesses, of the object cognized. Although images are important to Abelard's account of cognition, the image is only needed when direct cognition of the object via sense is not possible. Images are substitutes for present occurant experience. They are not necessary intermediates in the cognitive process. Nor are images in any way the object of cognition (except to think of a particular image as an image.)

In Abelard's paradigm case of cognition, there are three steps: sensation, imagination, and understanding. Sensation is a power of the mind not a power of the animate body. Through the sense organ the mind looks out "as if through a window" at the world. When a physical object is present—and all other conditions are appropriate—sensation provides an initial "confused conception" of the object. This initial conception is confused because, as yet, the mind does not grasp the nature or any property of the object. We are aware of the object but don't yet understand what it is. Imagination supplements the present sensation. If I see a tree at a distance through the sense of sight, I perceive the color and other proper objects of vision. Imagination adds texture and hardness and scent. Imagination can also provide the full substitute for absent objects. When sensation and/or imagination present this confused conception, the rational power of the mind can focus on the confused conception and focus its discerning attention on some nature or property of the object sensed or imagined. Abelard describes this as an act of understanding; it is the conscious and transient act of thinking about some thing or a nature or property of the thing. Abelard is explicit in claiming that the act of understanding is just a transient act of thinking about something. The understanding is not a concept. For Abelard the understanding is not the object of cognition nor is it object of knowledge (or as with some later nominalists the universal). Knowledge is the habit of having accurate acts of understanding something.

6. Ethics

Abelard's ethical thought is found primarily in two works, the Ethics, (or Know yourself), and the Dialogue Between a Philosopher, a Christian, and a Jew (or Colationes.) Unfortunately neither of these works is complete, and because these are late works, it is not clear whether the missing sections are lost, or were never completed. What we have is the mature thought of a man who had experienced much in life and deeply believed that an ethics based on love, for God and for neighbor, is an integral part of human existence. Abelard had lived an eventful and turbulent life. His ethical writings have an intensity that one would expect from a monk infamous for his careerist pride and his tragic love affair. Like Augustine before him, Abelard understood ethics from both sides.

In the Ethics Abelard develops a form of intentionalism; moral rightness or wrongness is a function of the intentions of the agent. He develops a purely intentionalist account of moral wrongness. Yet in order to avoid the sort of subjectivism or relativism that his account might initially suggest, he asserts a more complicated account of moral rightness. Abelard's concept of moral rightness and wrongness follows from his belief that God is both goodness and love, and we are thus commanded to love God and neighbor. Good intentions demonstrate love for God and neighbor, bad intentions scorn. Any intention to do what one believes to be wrong shows contempt for God as the source of all love and also contempt of neighbor as the proximate victim of the lack of love. One who intends to do what he believes to be good is, similarly, intending to demonstrate love. Such a person incurs no moral fault, but if he is to be truly morally good his belief must be correct.

Abelard develops a fairly complicated moral psychology in order to isolate exactly what consent and intention are and why these alone incur moral praise or blame. Abelard lists as the components of behavior (a) mental vice, (b) will or desire, (c) pleasure, (d) voluntariness, (e) consent and intention, and (f) the action or deed itself. In most cases the stars align: one has a vice, desires that the vice be satisfied, voluntarily consents with the intention of satisfying this desire, and takes pleasure in the successful completion of the bad act. For Abelard however, the only morally significant component on this list is (e) consent and intention. Each of these other components that make up immoral behavior is irrelevant to the moral assessment of the agent. The structure of Abelard's argument is clear and direct. He argues that each of these other components is either present in morally good behavior, or absent in immoral behavior and is morally irrelevant.

Consent and intention are thus intimately connected. To consent is simply to give oneself over to what one intends. The intention is the agent's understanding of what he is consenting to, including: the reasons for engaging in the action, his beliefs about the effects of the action, his evaluation of the morality of the action, and the end or goal the agent hopes to achieve by the action. An intention can in most cases explain why the agent undertook the action. An agent can be said to consent to an action only if he could provide an account of his intention. This is not to say that the account must be a good one. We can and do consent to all manner of actions with foolish and ill-conceived intentions.

Mental vice (a) and will or desire (b) can be dispensed with as sources of moral blame because they are beyond our control. Mental vice is simply the inclination towards evil. Some people are just born with strong natural inclinations to lust or gluttony or anger. Will or desire is a more reflective wanting of what one is inclined towards. It is not in an agent's power to change the fact that he has vices, wants, and desires. However whether he consents to satisfy the desires is in his control. To experience pleasure (c) is not, of itself, immoral. William of Champeaux had argued that pleasure was the result of our fallen state, in Eden there was no physical pleasure thus any experience of pleasure is immoral. Before the fall sex was no more pleasurable than "putting your finger in your mouth" (Sen. 254). Abelard disagrees. We feel pleasure because God made us in such a way that some things are pleasurable. If pleasure were bad then the fault would lay with God, not us. In a truly strange example Abelard describes a monk, dragged in chains, and forced to have sex with women. Abelard's monk is drawn by the softness of the bed and the touch of the women into pleasure but not consent. "Who" Abelard writes "can venture to call this pleasure nature has made necessary a sin?" (Spade, 1995: §42)

That the behavior is voluntary (d) is also not a defining characteristic of immoral behavior. This is the point at which Abelard disagrees with many other ethical theorists. Abelard not only believes in involuntary consent but also that we are morally responsible for involuntary consent. As Abelard sees it, much immoral behavior is at a fundamental level irrational and thus not voluntary. When an agent consents to commit adultery he consents to the act without wanting the punishment that necessarily follows. He wants his partner to be unmarried, or he wants the sixth commandment to be repealed. Acting in the hope that the moral laws of the universe will alter and allow an exception, just this once, is irrational. The agent's consent cannot be fully voluntary because he is consenting to something he knows cannot occur. Abelard argues further that a conflict between first and second order desires makes some behavior involuntary. An alcoholic may have a very strong first order desire to drink. This same alcoholic also has a very strong second order desire, namely, the desire not to desire alcohol. The alcoholic desperately wants a drink; he also desperately wants to be free from this desire for alcohol. When this alcoholic drinks alcohol the behavior is involuntary. He consents to drink. He knows what he is doing and he does it. Even though an agent is deeply confused he can still form an intention and consent to it. Abelard writes that such an agent is "compelled to want what he does not want to want. I don't see how this consent, that we do not want, can be called voluntary." (Spade, 1995: §33) Abelard nonetheless still considers it consent. If this account is correct, much immoral behavior will be involuntary but still something for which we are morally responsible.

Finally, Abelard argues that the act itself is morally irrelevant. Several of Abelard's arguments are reiterations of standard themes. He gives the Platonist/Augustinian claim that the act is irrelevant because nothing outside the soul could possibly harm the soul. He also voices a common enough mediaeval claim that all external events occur either by God's will or at God's sufferance, thus all external events are in some way good. He points out that we often act in ignorance. In what may be the first serious use of this defense, Abelard argues that if a man genuinely mistakes another woman for his wife he may physically act but he has not sinned because he did not consent to commit adultery. Conversely, a man who arranges to commit adultery and would follow through has committed adultery even if the woman does not show up.

More significant is Abelard's argument that external acts may be morally indistinguishable. Acts of "charity" can be done for many reasons other than love. The genuine misanthrope who donates to famine relief believing that death is the end of all pain and intending to increase the sum total of human misery does what is good but is not a good person. Strikingly, Abelard argues that the central event in Christian history, the crucifixion of Christ, was carried out by many agents, some praiseworthy for their participation, some not. Christ is to be praised; his consent to suffer crucifixion was morally right. He intended to do what was pleasing to God by redeeming mankind. Judas played an integral role also, but his consent to betray a man he believed to be the messiah was immoral. Even though his action was a necessary part of God's plan, Judas acted out of some combination of greed and fear, not out of loving obedience to God's plan. The Jews were morally blameless. The Jews believed that executing this convicted criminal was required by God. They were acting in accordance to what they believed to be God's will; to have done otherwise would have been a sin. The event of the Crucifixion was brought about by all these agents acting together. Jesus merits moral praise. He consented to what he believed was pleasing to God and his belief was correct. Judas is morally bad. He consented to what he believed was offensive to God. The Jews are blameless, but not morally good. They consented to what they believed was pleasing to God, but their belief was mistaken. The Jews sinned in act but not in fault: it is worse to sin in fault.

The basic question, "What does it mean to be a good person?", is still unanswered. To be good one must avoid not only sinning in fault but also sinning in action. One must intend to do what one believes shows love of God and neighbor, and these beliefs must be correct. Presumably Abelard would have offered a fuller account in book II of the Ethics or in the unfinished judgment of the Dialogue. His explanation likely would have relied heavily on his discussion of natural law. Through study of the natural law we can recognize goodness and love without divine revelation. There are precepts of natural law that we can discover and probably ought to know. Abelard discusses several examples to show that one can sin in action (violate the natural law) but not in fault (intentionally violate the natural law). Ignorance of these precepts may exonerate us from fault, but the existence of such precepts also means that there is an objective standard we must achieve in order to be morally good. Merely believing our intentions are good is not enough.

The Dialogue between a Philosopher, a Jew, and a Christian is really a pair of dialogues, the first between a Philosopher and a Jew, the second between a Christian and a Philosopher. The fictional circumstance is that a Philosopher (identified as a son of Ishmael and so likely a secular Arab, a notable choice some 35 years after the first crusade), a Jew, and a Christian are arguing over the nature of humanity's ultimate happiness, and the path to this ultimate happiness. Unable to reach a conclusion, the three come to Abelard begging him to act as judge. Abelard's judgment is missing.

In the dialogue between the Philosopher and the Jew, the Jew claims that the law of the Old Testament is the path to ultimate human happiness. The Jewish conception of the path to ultimate happiness is characterized as an exhaustive list of prescribed ritual and prohibited behavior. For many of the reasons discussed above, the philosopher argues that it is possible to obey all the precepts of the old law and yet intend to scorn and hate God. Explicit behavior is not necessarily reflective of the inner state of one's soul. The philosopher argues in turn that true happiness must be within our power to acquire and maintain. Since the only thing we have complete control over is our own soul, the basis for happiness must be internal and in our power to attain.

In the dialogue between the Philosopher and the Christian, the Philosopher defends the Stoic claim that ultimate happiness is the state of mental tranquility achieved when one has attained virtue. For the Philosopher, ultimate happiness is achievable in this life by the person who seeks virtue. The Christian argues that ultimate happiness is attainable only in the afterlife, and that it is different from any state attainable without divine grace. The Christian argues for a sort of beatific vision of God, in which those who love God are rewarded with a clear vision of God that inspires more love and hence clearer vision in an ever rising spiral of pure love and spiritual bliss. (Exactly the opposite happens to those who do not love God. They end up in an ever plummeting spiral of hate and loathing. They also suffer some spiritual equivalent of physical pain: the Christian in the dialogue is concerned that a sinner who does not love God may not subjectively suffer from the alienation from God's love.) The Philosopher is convinced by the Christian's arguments. Abelard's judgment is missing but his own view is likely a combination of these two positions, a Christianizing of Stoicism. Seeking and developing virtue is the path to human happiness, but true happiness is not attainable by human means alone. We need grace. Since human virtue requires that we understand and demonstrate love in this life we are primed to receive and accept this grace. True happiness is then the spiritual bliss and tranquility that comes with the ever rising love and understanding of God. Although without the conclusion to the Dialogue it is impossible to know how Abelard would have worked out many of the details.

7. References and Further Reading

a. General Surveys of Abelard's Philosophical Works

Any one of the following is an excellent place to look for fuller account of Abelard's thought. Each of these sources also contains a complete list of Abelard's works in Latin editions.

  • Brower, J., Guilfoy, K. The Cambridge Companion to Peter Abelard. (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2004).
  • Marenbon, J. The Philosophy of Peter Abelard. (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1997).
  • Marenbon, J. "The Rediscovery of Peter Abelard's Philosophy". Journal of the History of Philosophy 44.3 (2006) 331-351.
  • Mews, C. Abelard and Heloise. (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2005).

b. Life

  • Abelard, P. Historia calamitatum. B. Radice (trans.), The Letters of Abelard and Heloise. (London: Penguin, 1974).
  • Clanchy, M. T. Abelard: A Medieval Life. (Oxford: Blackwell Publishers, 1997).
  • Mews, C. Peter Abelard. Authors of the Middle Ages: historical and religious writers of the Latin West. (Aldershot, Hants.: Variorum, 1995).

c. Universals

  • Abelard, P. Logica Ingredientibus commentary of Porphyry's Isagoge. P Spade (trans.), Five Texts on the Medieval Problem of Universals: Porphyry, Boethius, Abelard, Duns Scotus, Ockham. (Indianapolis: Hackett, 1994).
  • King, P. Peter Abailard and the Problem of Universals in the Twelfth Century. (Ph.D. Diss. Princeton University, 1982).
  • Tweedale, M. M. Abailard on Universals. (Amsterdam: North-Holland, 1976).

d. Logic, Metaphysics, and Philosophy of Mind

There is much scholarly dispute as to how far Abelard intended to take his reductive project in metaphysics, as well as debate about how successful he ultimately was. King 2004 presents Abelard as an extreme "irrealist" about everything except individuals. Marenbon 1997 and 2005 argues for a more moderate reductivism, arguing that there are several items Abelard could not eliminate from his ontology and suggesting it would have been unwise to have tried. Tweedale 1976 describes a category of "non-things" in Abelard's ontology. These are items that exist but are not individuals. Arlig 2005 draws a distinction between particulars and individuals arguing that everything that exists is particular, that is discrete from everything else, but not everything is an individual.

  • Abelard, P. Logica Ingredientibus commentary on De Interpretatione. Selections on mind and language translated in King 1982: vol ii.
  • Abelard, P. Logica Nostrorum Petitoni Sociorum. Selections on genera and differentia translated in King 1982 vol ii.
  • Abelard, P. Tractatus de Intellectibus (= A Treatise on Understandings). Translated in King 1982, vol ii.
  • Arlig, A. A Study in Early Medieval Mereology: Boethius, Abelard, and Pseudo-Joscelin. (Ph.D. Diss. Ohio State University, 2005).
  • Guilfoy, K. "Mind and Cognition." In The Cambridge Companion to Peter Abelard. Ed. J. Brower and K. Guilfoy. (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2004).
  • Jacobi, K. "Philosophy of Language" In The Cambridge Companion to Peter Abelard. Ed. J. Brower and K. Guilfoy. (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2004).
  • King, P. "Metaphysics." In The Cambridge Companion to Peter Abelard. Ed. J. Brower and K. Guilfoy. (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2004).
  • Kretzmann, N. "The culmination of the old logic in Peter Abelard." In Renaissance and Renewal in the Twelfth Century, Eds. R. L. Benson and G. Constable, 488–511. (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1982).
  • Martin C. "Logic." In The Cambridge Companion to Peter Abelard. Ed. J. Brower and K. Guilfoy. (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2004).

e. Ethics

  • Abelard, P. Dialogue between a Philosopher, a Jew, and a Christian (or Collationes). Orlandi, G. and J. Marenbon (trans). Peter Abelard: Collationes. Oxford medieval texts. (Oxford: Clarendon 2001) also translated in Spade 1995.
  • Abelard, P. Ethics (or Scitote Ipsum). trans Spade P. Peter Abelard, Ethical Writings: His Ethics or "Know Yourself" and his Dialogue between a Philosopher, a Jew, and a Christian. (Indianapolis: Hackett, 1995).
  • Mann, W. "Ethics." In The Cambridge Companion to Peter Abelard. Ed. J. Brower and K. Guilfoy. (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2004).
  • Williams, T. "Sin Grace and Redemption." In The Cambridge Companion to Peter Abelard. Ed. J. Brower and K. Guilfoy. (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2004).

f. William of Champeaux

William's works are not easily accessible. In many cases all that is easily found are excerpts of unedited manuscripts quoted in other sources. Guilfoy 2005 contains a full list of sources for William's writings. Citations for works cited in this article are provided here.

  • Guilfoy, K. "William of Champeaux." in Zalta E. The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Winter 2005 Edition).
  • Iwakuma, Y. "Pierre Abélard et Guillaume de Champeaux dans les premières années du XIIe siècle: Une étude préliminaire," in Langage, sciences, philosophie au XIIe siècle. Ed. J. Baird. Paris: Vrin, 1999.
  • Marenbon, J. "Life Milieu, and Intellectual Contexts." In The Cambridge Companion to Peter Abelard. Ed. J. Brower and K. Guilfoy. (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2004).
  • William of Champeaux. Sententiae, ed. Lottin, O. Psychologie et Morale au XIIe et XIIIe siècles. vol v, (Gembloux: Duculot, 1959).

Author Information

Kevin Guilfoy
Carroll College
U. S. A.

Medieval Theories of Free Will

Why do human beings perform the actions they perform? What moves them to act? Why do we blame a human being for knocking over the vase and not the family dog? What gives us the idea that we are free to choose as we wish, that we have free will? These and other questions about human action have fascinated philosophers for centuries. Throughout the thousand year period of the Middle Ages, scholars provided a wide variety of different answers to these questions. These thinkers developed theories both remarkable and original in their own right that continue to be of interest to scholars working in this area today. While they shared an understanding of human psychology and enjoyed a common intellectual heritage, they nevertheless maintained a lively and diverse conversation on this topic throughout the whole of the Middle Ages, providing us with a sophisticated intellectual inheritance.

This article considers a wide range of theories written throughout the Middle Ages, from the foundational work of Augustine in the early part of the period through that of John Duns Scotus at the end. It notes the ways in which later work on the topic builds upon that developed earlier, shows the lively disagreements that often arose on the topic, and, although medieval thinkers worked within a different framework than philosophers do today, reveals how their discussions share certain affinities.

Table of Contents

  1. Medieval and Current Understandings of Free Will
  2. Individual Theories - the Early Middle Ages
    1. Augustine
    2. Anselm of Canterbury
    3. Bernard of Clairvaux
  3. Individual Theories - Sentences Commentaries
    1. Peter Lombard
    2. Albert the Great
  4. Individual Theories - the High Middle Ages
    1. Thomas Aquinas
    2. John Duns Scotus
  5. Conclusion
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Medieval and Current Understandings of Free Will

Although at first glance it might not seem so, medieval philosophers were concerned with many of the same issues that interest philosophers today. The current discussion of action focuses on the topic of free will: whether free will is compatible with causal determinism, and the relationship between free will and moral responsibility. Medieval thinkers also discussed many of these issues; for example, they accept the common intuition that unless one acts freely, one cannot be held morally responsible for what one does. But the structure of their discussion often makes it difficult to recognize the extent to which their concerns both resemble and deviate from the current debate. Thinkers in the early part of the Middle Ages discussed human action and freedom in the context of broader theological concerns such as the problem of evil or the effects of the Fall, that is, the sin of the first human beings. As the Middle Ages progressed, scholars became more interested in discussing the nature of freedom for its own sake, apart from the particular theological problems in which free will forms an important part of their solution. Thus, discussions of free will become embedded in larger treatises of human psychology. This is not to say that later theorists lost interest in those theological problems; rather, discussions of the two issues diverged from each other and became discrete subjects of investigation.

Medieval philosophers did not ask the question whether free will was compatible with causal determinism, not because they did not understand the ramifications of cause and effect or because they lacked a scientific notion of the world. They recognized the regularities of the world and understood the implications of a mechanistic world-view. They did not ask this question because they accepted the position that the freedom of human action is incompatible with causal determinism and because they believed that human beings in fact do act freely, at least on some occasions. Thus, in current terms, they were libertarians about human freedom. They argued that human beings are importantly different from other animals and the rest of creation. Human beings act freely because they possess rational capacities, which are lacking in other animals. Rational capacities enable human beings to act freely because those capacities are immaterial. How does the immateriality of those capacities enable human beings to act freely? The argument, roughly, is as follows: Everything else in the world is made of matter and thus is material or physical. Material things are governed by particular laws and so are determined to particular activities. If human beings were wholly material, then their actions would also be determined and they would not act freely. But because the capacities that bring about action are immaterial in nature, and hence, not governed by physical laws, actions that come about as a result of those capacities will be uncoerced, at least under ordinary circumstances. According to medieval accounts of freedom, then, freedom is incompatible with causal determinism (although medieval philosophers would not express the point in these terms). Since they all agree on this issue, medieval accounts of freedom then attempt to answer the question "how is it that human beings are able to act freely?" The answer to this question was hotly contested.

All medieval theorists agreed that human beings have a soul that enables them to perform the actions that they perform. As the era progressed, theories of human psychology grew more and more elaborate, but even in the earliest theories, two capacities in particular stood out: the intellect and the will. The intellect is the human capacity to cognize. The will is the human motivational capacity; it is the capacity that moves us to do what we do. The will depends upon the intellect to identify what alternatives for action are possible and desirable. It is on the basis of these intellectually cognized alternatives that the will chooses. Medieval theorists recognized that it is the human being who thinks and who acts, but it is in virtue of having an intellect and having a will that human beings are able to do what they do. Talk about what the intellect thinks or what the will does is a kind of shorthand for what the individual does in virtue of those capacities In light of a common theory of human psychology, the medieval debate centered upon whether human beings act freely primarily in virtue of their wills or in virtue of their intellects. Those who argue that freedom is primarily a function of the intellect are known as intellectualists while those who argue that freedom is primarily a function of the will are known as voluntarists, from the Latin word for will, voluntas.

2. Individual Theories - the Early Middle Ages

a. Augustine

Augustine was interested in the topic of human action and freedom because he needed to explain how it is that God is not responsible for the presence of evil in the world while at the same time holding that God sustains and governs the world. On his view, human beings do evil things when they give in to their desires for the temporal things instead of pursuing eternal things such as knowledge, virtue, and God. His theory of human nature is rather rudimentary, but it helps to establish the foundation for later more elaborate accounts. Human beings possess the rational capacities of intellect and will as well as sensory capabilities and desire. Human beings perceive the world around them, including what things are available to be pursued, through their senses. Such data can also stimulate basic desires. This information is fed to the intellect, which makes judgments about the contents of perception and desire. Choices as to what to do are made in virtue of the will. Augustine argues that desire can never overwhelm an agent; because they have intellects and wills, agents are not determined by basic bodily desires. Rather, an agent gives in to desire in virtue of the will, which operates freely and never under compulsion. In fact, if a will were ever coerced, Augustine says it would not be a will. Thus, human beings commit sins freely by giving into the desire for temporal things, which the intellect and will could disregard in favor of the eternal things that human beings ought to pursue. Since human beings act freely, Augustine argues that they, and not God, are responsible for evil in the world.

Early in his career, Augustine was very optimistic about the human ability to resist temptation and sin. He argued that all one had to do in order to avoid sin was simply to will against it. This got him into a bit of trouble with a particular heresy of the time - Pelagianism. Pelagius was a contemporary of Augustine's who held that human beings are able to bring about their own salvation and do not require grace from God. This position contradicts the traditional Christian view of the Fall of Adam and Eve and the need for the Incarnation of Jesus and grace from God. Not surprisingly, Pelagius took Augustine's early writings to be favorable to his own position. Augustine argued that Pelagius misinterpreted his early views, and in his later writings, he was much more careful to insist upon the pernicious effects of sin upon human behavior and the need for God's grace in order to avoid sin and achieve salvation. This sets up a tension with his insistence upon free will that exercised the minds of later theorists and one that Augustine himself did not entirely resolve.

b. Anselm of Canterbury

Anselm's account of action and freedom reflects a broadly Augustinian framework. Like Augustine, Anselm describes human action in terms of the workings of intellect and will. Anselm also accepts the view that unless human beings act freely, they cannot be held responsible for their actions and God will be blamed for sin. Worries over the effect of sin and grace also help to structure his account.

Anselm rejects the notion that one must be able to act in ways other than they do in order to be free. If freedom had to be defined in these terms, then God, the good angels, the blessed in heaven, the bad angels, and the damned in hell could not be free since they lack this ability to do otherwise. God, the good angels, and the blessed cannot bring about evil while the bad angels and the damned cannot bring about the good. In the medieval theological tradition, God is perfectly good so it is not possible for God to will or perform evil. Medieval theologians also argued that rational beings (human beings, angels) admitted into heaven are confirmed in the good in such a way that they are unable to choose what is bad, while rational beings who are sent to hell are confirmed in evil in such a way that they are unable to chose what is good. But Anselm believes that all of these individuals act freely even though they cannot act in ways other than they do. This is especially the case for God, who is the freest of them all. Therefore, Anselm argues freedom cannot consist in the ability to do otherwise; another account of freedom must be developed. The question, then, is how does Anselm understand the notion of freedom?

Anselm presents two different accounts of freedom, which nevertheless are related. In De libertate arbitrii (commonly translated as On Freedom of Choice), he defines freedom as "the ability to preserve uprightness of will for its own sake." He argues that rational beings have this ability insofar as they possess intellects by which they come to understand how to preserve uprightness of will and insofar as they possess the will itself in virtue of which they will to preserve that uprightness. This might seem like a strange definition of freedom, but given the connection to moral responsibility, Anselm understands freedom not in terms of being able to act differently than one does. Rather, he understands freedom in terms of whether one has the ability to do the right thing for the right reason. It is obvious that God, the good angels, and the blessed in heaven all possess this ability, but what about sinners in this life, who from the Christian perspective are now slaves to sin in virtue of their sin? One can raise an analogous worry about the demons and the damned in hell, both of whom are confirmed in evil. Anselm needs to explain how they retain the ability to do the right thing given that they are unable to do the right thing.

Anselm explains this seemingly contradictory situation by drawing upon a distinction between possessing an ability and exercising that ability. Because sinners, demons, and the damned all possess intellect and will, they retain the ability to preserve uprightness of will. They are, however, unable to exercise that ability because of the hindrance of sin. Anselm explains this by analogy with sight. One retains the ability to see a mountain even though on a cloudy day, one cannot in fact see it due to the hindrance of the clouds. Similarly, one who is a slave to sin or who is confirmed in evil retains the ability to maintain uprightness of will even though one cannot actually maintain that uprightness because being a slave to sin or confirmation in evil hinders one from doing so. Thus, Anselm agrees with Augustine that it takes an act of God to restore the sinner to a state of grace, although human beings are capable of losing that grace by their own evil (and free) choices.

Anselm's second account of freedom can be called the "two-wills account." In his treatise, On the Fall of the Devil, he develops a thought-experiment in which he imagines that God is creating an angel from scratch. At the point where God has given the angel under construction only a will for happiness, the angel cannot act freely. For at this point, the angel is necessitated to will happiness and those things required for its happiness and is not able to refrain from willing happiness. Thus, the angel's act of willing happiness is not free, for the angel could will nothing but happiness. Anselm then asks whether the situation would be any different should God give the angel only a will for justice, In this case, Anselm insists that the angel does not will justice freely since the angel is necessitated to will justice and is not able not to will justice. Only when God gives the angel both a will for happiness and a will for justice does the angel will freely. For now the angel is not necessitated to will happiness, for he could will justice; nor is the angel necessitated to will justice, for he could will happiness.

There are several questions that come to mind about this second account of freedom. First, there is the worry that Anselm is now relying on a principle that he rejected in the first account of freedom, that is, the idea that freedom requires the ability to do otherwise. Secondly, one can ask about the relationship between the two accounts. This second issue is easier to address than the first. One can see in Anselm's two-wills account of freedom a further development of how the will of the first account is able to maintain uprightness of will for its own sake. If the will had only the will for justice, it would will justice, not because it is the right thing to do, but because it must do so. If the will had only the will for happiness, then it could not will justice at all. Thus, it is only when the will has both the will for justice and the will for happiness that the will has the ability to maintain uprightness for the sake of uprightness. That is to say that the will has the ability to will the right thing (that is, justice) for the right reason.

The first issue is harder to resolve. Anselm implies that having the will for happiness means that one need not will justice and vice versa. Thus, one who has both wills is able to will justly or not, as it pleases the agent. This implies that the one who follows the will for justice could have abandoned justice to follow the will for happiness and vice versa. But this implies the ability to act otherwise and also implies that God and the blessed could abandon justice for happiness while the demons and the damned could abandon happiness for justice, both of which Anselm denies. The answer to this conundrum lies in Anselm's reply to a third issue raised by his discussion.

This third issue addresses the apparent implication that the pursuit of justice could require an agent to sacrifice her own happiness. For in following the will for justice, the agent turns away from the will for happiness and vice versa. This implies that an agent could be in a situation where doing what is right will make her unhappy. Anselm responds by arguing that genuine happiness never conflicts with justice. When agents are struggling between the demands of morality and happiness, the happiness in question is only apparent. For example, consider the college student who is tempted to spend the scholarship money, not on her tuition, but rather on a new car. Obviously she ought to pay the tuition bill, but she really, really wants the car and thinks she'll be much happier with it. Anselm would argue that in the long run, the education will make her happier; for one thing, the hope is that it will lead to a better paying job that will enable her to get the car. Thus, doing the right thing in the long run will coincide with her happiness, regardless of whether she recognizes this in the short run. Anselm characterizes the will for happiness as a will for our own benefit, what we think will be advantageous to ourselves, what appears desirable to us, regardless of whether it in fact will make us happy. What actually makes us happy is pursuing happiness in the right way, that is, by doing what is in fact the right thing to do. Thus, for Anselm, there is no actual conflict between happiness and justice.

This answer helps him to resolve the first issue. The agent who acts justly simply because it is the right thing to do de facto satisfies the will for happiness. Those who act justly for its own sake recognize the connection between justice and happiness and so would not forsake justice for the sake of happiness; it would be inconceivable to them to do so. But they act freely insofar as they are not necessitated to justice in virtue of having both wills. Thus, they act freely even though they cannot act otherwise. Those who are confirmed in evil fail or failed to take seriously the connection between justice and genuine happiness. They have chosen to follow the will for happiness and, by pursuing the will for happiness in an unjust manner, forsake justice. Because they are fixed upon their own happiness, it would be inconceivable to them to pursue the will for justice even though they realize that they would be better off to do so. But they act freely insofar as they are not necessitated to happiness in virtue of having both wills. Thus, they act freely even though they cannot act otherwise.

c. Bernard of Clairvaux

Bernard (1090-1153) is not often thought of in connection with philosophy; he was an abbot and an important religious reformer as well as a prominent promoter of the First Crusade. But he wrote a short treatise titled On Grace and Free Will that was rather influential during the twelfth and first half of the thirteenth centuries. Although Bernard is mainly concerned with theological worries such as the influence of grace upon human freedom, he contributes to the voluntarist climate of the Middle Ages. He moves the discussion even further than either Augustine or Anselm, for he is one of the first medieval theorists to define the will as a rational appetite, that is, an appetite that is responsive to reasons. Such an idea is merely nascent in Anselm.

Like Augustine and Anselm before him, Bernard acknowledges that moral responsibility requires that human beings perform their actions freely. He argues that human beings act freely primarily in virtue of the will. The intellect is not entirely irrelevant; Bernard claims that only those who have an intellect and are capable of engaging in thought are capable of acting freely. Thus, children, non-rational animals, and the mentally handicapped do not act freely. As they mature, however, children become more able to do so, as do those who recover from mental illness. Nevertheless, the intellect is merely an instrument by which the will is able to exercise its primary activity, which is to choose. The will depends upon the intellect to identify what choices are available from which the will can choose. We cannot choose what we are not aware of. But once the intellect has made apparent potential alternatives for action, its job is finished. The will makes the final choice of what is to be done. Thus, it is ultimately in virtue of the will that human beings perform free actions. Furthermore, on Bernard's account, the will is so free that nothing can determine its choices, not even the intellect. He argues that the will is free to will against a judgment of the intellect. For example, the intellect could judge that some action is against God's decrees, and therefore not to be done, yet the will could still choose this action. Such cases, of course, happen all the time, and Bernard argues that if the will were not free to will against a particular judgment of the intellect, that would in essence destroy it. This idea that the will is able to will against a judgment of intellect will be an important claim in the late thirteenth century debates.

3. Individual Theories - Sentences Commentaries

a. Peter Lombard

Peter Lombard was a twelfth-century bishop of Paris and a theologian at what was to become the University of Paris. The final edition of his most famous work, Sententiae in IV libris distinctae, was released for circulation somewhere around 1155-57. This book became the standard theological textbook at universities throughout Europe from the thirteenth into the sixteenth centuries. It is divided into four books, the first of which has to do with God; the second, with creatures, both human and angelic, and their fall from grace; the third, with the incarnation and redemption of Jesus; and the fourth with the instruments of redemption, that is, the virtues and the sacraments. Writing a commentary on the Sentences became a standard student practice at universities during the Middle Ages.

Although use of the Latin phrase, liberum arbitrium, goes all the back to Augustine, Lombard provides a definition for it that dominates the discussion of freedom in the first half of the thirteenth century: liberum arbitrium is a faculty of intellect and will. This term, for which there is no satisfactory English translation, refers to that power or capacity that enables human beings to perform their actions freely. Lombard's definition appears to be fairly straightforward, but theorists in the first half of the thirteenth century very much disagreed over how it was to be interpreted. Part of the problem is that Lombard himself did not discuss the meaning of the definition in any great detail. Instead, he went on to discuss the place of liberum arbitrium in a larger theological scheme, addressing such questions as whether God has liberum arbitrium, the status of liberum arbitrium both before and after the Fall, and the effects of grace upon liberum arbitrium.

Although later theologians make note of Lombard's discussion of these topics, they are far more interested in what he didn't discuss, that is, the basic definition of liberum arbitrium. In the first half of the thirteenth century, there occurs a lively discussion on how to interpret this definition. As far as the participants in this discussion are concerned, there are four possibilities, and there are texts from this period defending each of these possibilities. To say that liberum arbitrium is a faculty of intellect and will could mean 1) that freedom is a function primarily of the intellect and only secondarily of the will 2) that freedom is a function primarily of the will and only secondarily of the intellect 3) that freedom is equally a function of both intellect and will and 4) that freedom is a function of a third capacity independently of intellect and will but with both cognitive and appetitive abilities. Because the fourth interpretation is the most implausible (and the rarest and possibly for those reasons the most interesting) and because it was held by one of the foremost scholars in the medieval period (Albert the Great), it warrants a further look.

b. Albert the Great

Outside of scholarly circles, Albert the Great is largely a forgotten figure or, at best, is known merely as the teacher of Thomas Aquinas. In the thirteenth century, however, he was in fact one of the most famous and respected scholars of the period. He published a wide variety of writings in philosophy, theology, and especially in what we would call natural science. He wrote a number of commentaries on the works of Aristotle and argued for his importance at a time when many of Aristotle's texts were banned from study at Europe's universities. Albert's theory of action is one of the most distinctive parts of his philosophy and one of the most innovative theories of the Middle Ages.

Albert takes as his starting point Lombard's definition of liberum arbitrium and argues that it should not be interpreted too narrowly. He describes four distinct stages in the production of free human action. First, the intellect identifies viable alternatives for action from which to choose and makes a judgment about what to do. Secondly, the will develops a preference for one of the alternatives identified by the intellect and inclines toward it. Third, a choice is made between the alternative judged by the intellect and the alternative preferred by the will. The capacity for choice is exercised by a power separate from both intellect and will, which Albert calls liberum arbitrium. Finally, the choice is carried out by the will, which inclines the agent to perform the action chosen by liberum arbitrium.

One might worry that the aforementioned description of action implies that human beings are "at the mercy" of their capacities and so are not in charge of their own actions. This is a mistaken judgment. Albert is aware that it is human beings who think, judge, prefer, choose and finally act. What Albert is attempting to explain is how human beings are capable of engaging in all of these activities. He is providing what we might call a microscopic explanation for what happens at the macroscopic level. This is analogous to, say, the neuroscientist providing an explanation for why someone raises her arm in terms of what is happening on the level of the nerves firing and the muscles contracting. We of course assume that such an explanation does not negate our judgment that the agent has control over whether she moves her arm; it is the same in the case of Albert's explanation.

Albert argues that this account is compatible with Lombard's definition of liberum arbitrium. He argues that on his account, liberum arbitrium is a faculty of intellect and will, not because it consists of intellect and will, but because it works with intellect and will. Unless the intellect makes a judgment about what to do, and unless the will inclines toward a particular alternative (whether it be the same or different from the intellect's judgment), there is no choice made by liberum arbitrium. Intellect and will make possible the activity of liberum arbitrium. Thus, liberum arbitrium is a power of intellect and will, not because it is composed of intellect and will, as one might think, but because it operates on the basis what goes on beforehand in intellect and will.

Recall that the whole purpose of liberum arbitrium was to frame the discussion of human freedom. Liberum arbitrium is a placeholder for whatever it is that enables human beings to act freely. Albert argues that liberum arbitrium must be a power distinct from intellect and will because of certain deficiencies or constraints in both intellect and will. The intellect cannot be the source of human freedom, for it is the power by which human beings cognize the world and come to understand truth. Thus, its judgments are constrained by the way the world is; we are not free to decide what we will and will not believe if we want to have truth as our goal. A reality that is not of our own making intrudes. By and large, that is how we want our intellects to operate. Our success in the world depends upon our being able to make accurate judgments about how the world is and what options are open to us. We will return to this view because it has certain implications for Thomas Aquinas's account of freedom, which implications John Duns Scotus explicitly draws on in his criticism of Aquinas's account. But for now, we want to see what use Albert makes of this observation. According to Albert, the constraints found in the intellect make it the case that the intellect cannot be the source of human freedom.

But then neither can the will. Albert notes that what distinguishes the actions of human beings from that of other animals is the human ability to contravene felt desires. To take a medieval example, if a sheep is hungry and spies a lush field of grass, the sheep eats in response to a brute felt desire for food. If the sheep is not hungry, the sheep does not eat even if it is standing in the pasture. What determine the sheep's activities are the sheep's desires and appetites over which the sheep has no control. It is different in the human case. A human being can feel hungry but not act on that hunger because she can judge that she has compelling reasons not to eat, say because she is waiting for her blood to be drawn for a fasting glucose level. Thus, she has a choice; she can choose either to eat or not to eat depending upon her reasons for doing one thing over the other. This ability to act on the basis of reasons, which confers freedom of action on human beings, is a cognitive ability. Since the will is an appetitive power, it cannot have this ability. The intellect is a cognitive power but is constrained by the way the world is and so cannot be the source of this ability. Albert concludes therefore that human beings must have a third power that enables them to have this ability, which power he identifies with liberum arbitrium.

4. Individual Theories - the High Middle Ages

a. Thomas Aquinas

Thomas Aquinas developed one of the most elaborate and detailed accounts of action in the Middle Ages. It is a testimony to his account that not only scholars of medieval philosophy but also non-historically oriented philosophers remain interested in the details of his view.

Aquinas's account is roughly Aristotelian in character. Like Aristotle, Aquinas argues that human beings act for the sake of a particular end that they see as a good. Furthermore, he thinks that all human actions aim (directly or indirectly) at an ultimate end. This ultimate end is the final goal or object that human beings are trying to achieve. Aquinas follows Aristotle in arguing that the ultimate end of human life, that which human beings want most of all, is happiness. But Aquinas parts company with Aristotle in arguing that what in fact makes human beings happy is to know and love God.

Aquinas recognizes that such a definition of happiness is highly controversial. He concedes that not everyone agrees that the ultimate goal of human life is union with God. But he takes it as uncontroversial that all human beings desire happiness regardless of whether they agree with him with respect to what in fact constitutes happiness. Given Aquinas's theological commitments, it is not surprising that he would think that what in fact will make human beings happy (whether they know it or not) is to be in a relationship with the creator and sustainer of the world.

Aquinas presents a detailed account of what goes on when human beings perform a particular course of action. This account reveals a close interaction between intellect and will in bringing about the action. In considering this account, one must keep in mind that although the description that follows is put in terms of a series of steps, these steps have only logical priority and not necessarily temporal priority. For example, Aquinas cites deliberation and choice as distinct steps, but he is willing to grant that one might not spend time deliberating over what to do. One might simply recognize what the situation calls for and choose to do it. In that case, the judgment or recognition of what to do and the choice come about simultaneously. However, Aquinas would insist that the judgment has logical priority insofar as one cannot choose what one is not at least on some level (and perhaps very quickly) cognizant of.

In bringing about a human action, first, human beings have some goal or end in mind when they think about what to do. Without that goal or end, they would in fact never act. Human beings don't act for the sake of acting; there is always something they are trying to achieve by their actions. In other words, human behavior is always motivated. So human beings think about what they want to accomplish and settle upon a goal. This they do in virtue of their intellects in light of their fundamental desire for the good, which is built into the will. Next they feel an attraction or desire for that goal or end; their will inclines them toward it. Then they begin to think about how to achieve this goal or end; that is to say, they engage in the activity of deliberation. They then make a final judgment about what to do and choose what to do on the basis of that judgment. Aquinas argues that choice is a function of the will in light of a judgment by the intellect. In other words, the will moves the agent towards a particular action, an action that has been determined by the intellect. The will then moves the appropriate limbs of the bodies at the command of the intellect, thus executing the action. Finally, human beings feel enjoyment at their accomplishment or achievement of the end in virtue of the will.

Another aspect of human nature influences human action, and that is what Aquinas calls the passions. Passions are somewhat akin to our conception of emotions. That is, they are felt motivational states such as anger or joy that can have either a positive or a negative effect upon what we do. For example, fear and love for a child can move an otherwise timid individual to push the child out of the way of a speeding car. On the other hand, anger can move an otherwise peaceful person to road rage. Nevertheless, on Aquinas's account, even though passions are very powerful influences upon actions and can make things appear to us as good that ordinarily would not seem good, the passions cannot simply overwhelm a (properly functioning) intellect and will and thereby determine what we do. Aquinas argues that it is always possible for us to step back and consider whether we should act on our passion as long as we possess a functional intellect and will. It might be difficult to do, since passions can be very strong, but it is always open to us to do so.

This of course is a very brief and succinct description of an account to which Aquinas devotes a significant portion of his texts. What it illustrates though is the complexity of what goes on in the course of producing an action and the ways in which the intellect and will interact with each other in producing a human action. We of course are not necessarily conscious of all of this activity, but Aquinas's account does not depend upon our being so. He relies on the principle that if a human being is able to do something, there must be some power or capacity that enables her to do so. He then considers what goes on in the course of human action and postulates the kinds of powers or capacities that he thinks human beings must have in order to account for what goes on. So while from a strictly empirical or even scientific viewpoint, Aquinas's account might seem rather quaint, still from a heuristic perspective, Aquinas's account remains quite powerful.

One of the ways in which its power is revealed is in Aquinas's account of good and bad action. He uses his basic framework for action to set up the account. Recall that action is ultimately a function of intellect and will with the potential influence of the passions. Bad action for Aquinas comes about in light of a breakdown of one of these capacities. Because the intellect has to do with knowledge and judgment, sins of the intellect have to do with mistakes in judgment due to ignorance (that is, a lack of knowledge). Aquinas also recognizes that wrongdoing can come about under the influence of passion. Although on his view, the passions are not able to overwhelm a properly functioning intellect and will, still the intellect can give in to passion under inappropriate circumstances (road rage is an obvious example). And finally, because the will is a type of (rational) desire, sins due to the will arise when one's desire for the good is disordered, leading one to prefer a lesser good, forsaking a greater good that ought to be preferred.

For an action to count as a good action, it must satisfy several conditions. First, it must be a morally acceptable type of action. For Aquinas, such acts as murder, lying, stealing, or adultery are never right, regardless of, say, the circumstances or the end. They are in themselves disordered acts insofar as they, by their very nature, do not promote human flourishing. Secondly, the action must be performed for an appropriate end. Ordinarily, alms-giving is a good act, but it would be a bad action if one were to give alms for the sake of vainglory. And finally the act must be performed in the appropriate circumstances. Ordinarily one would be praised for taking a walk in order to maintain one's health, but not if there is a blizzard raging outside. Under ordinary conditions (for example, no one's life is at risk), it would be more appropriate under those circumstances to skip the walk.

For Aquinas, although some acts might be morally neutral in nature (that is, neither promoting nor detracting from human flourishing by their nature), because there are no neutral ends or circumstances, in the final analysis, no actually performed actions are truly morally neutral. Ends are either good or bad for Aquinas. Circumstances are either appropriate or not. Thus, for Aquinas, the range of actions that are candidates for moral appraisal is much broader than one often supposes. Even actions ordinarily considered rather innocuous, such as eating a candy bar or raking leaves, have moral significance for Aquinas.

Finally, although Aquinas is not a utilitarian, he does think that consequences can have an effect on the moral appraisal of an action. What matters is whether the consequences that result from performing the action are the typical consequences associated with an action of that type and whether the agent was in a position to know this. If the agent could have foreseen those consequences, then bad consequences increase the agent's blameworthiness and good consequences increase the agent's praiseworthiness. If the agent could not have foreseen such consequences, then they have no effect on the moral appraisal of the action.

Aquinas is interested not only in how human action comes about, but also in what enables human beings to act freely. Given his emphasis on the intellect in his account of action, it is not surprising to find Aquinas arguing that the intellect plays the larger role in the explanation of freedom. This is in contrast with the tradition he inherits, which, as we have seen so far, places the emphasis on the will in the majority of theories. For Aquinas, the fact that the intellect is able to deliberate, consider, and reconsider reasons for choosing various courses of action open to the agent enables the agent to act freely. The will is free but only insofar as the intellect is free to make or revise its judgments. Had the agent decided differently than she did, she would have chosen differently. Thus, freedom in the will is dependent upon and derivative upon freedom in the intellect. As we shall see, this position raises certain potential worries for Aquinas.

b. John Duns Scotus

John Duns Scotus was born in the town of Duns near the English-Scottish boarder sometime in the 1260s. Educated both in England and at the University of Paris, he died in Cologne, Germany in 1308. Known for the complexity of his thought, he was referred to in the Middle Ages as the Subtle Doctor.

Scotus argues that if Aquinas is correct, human beings do not act freely. This is because in Scotus's view, the intellect is determined by the external environment, a position we saw earlier in Albert the Great. Scotus argues that the content of our beliefs and judgments is a function of the world around us and not within our control. If I see a table in front of me and I am functioning normally, I cannot help but believe that there is a table in front of me. I have some control over my beliefs; I can choose to acquire beliefs about quantum mechanics that I did not have before simply by choosing to read a book on the subject. I can take the table out of the room so that I no longer believe that there is a table in front of me. But even here my beliefs are fixed once I finish my manipulations of the world; ultimately then, I have no control over their content. Once I read the book, I have beliefs based upon what I have read and I am not in a position to alter their content unless I read something further. Once I move the table, the world as it exists at that point structures my belief about the table. As we mentioned before, this is how we want the world and our beliefs to function. If we could not arrive at beliefs that accurately reflected the state of the world around us, we would not survive. Scotus argues that this feature of our beliefs and their relationship to the world means that the intellect is not free. Thus, if Aquinas is correct that the movement of the will is determined by activity in the intellect, then if it is true that the intellect is not free, the will is not free either, and human beings would not act freely.

Scotus denies Aquinas's tight connection between the intellect and the will, arguing that the will is not determined by a judgment of the intellect, a position we first noted in Bernard of Clairvaux. Scotus draws upon our ordinary experience to defend this claim. We have all been in situations where we know what we ought to do and yet we are not moved to do it. The student knows she ought to study for her exams, but she is so comfortable lying on the couch that she does not get up to study. She will get up to study only insofar as she really wants to do so, and no judgment will move her to do so in opposition to her desire. Scotus describes this kind of case as one in which the will, the source of her desire to remain on the couch, wills (or in this case fails to will) in opposition to the judgment of the intellect. Thus, the will is free of determination by the intellect.

Scotus agrees with Aquinas that the will depends upon the intellect to identify possible courses of action from which the will chooses, but he rejects Aquinas's view that the intellect's judgment determines the will's choice. For Scotus, the intellect makes a judgment about what to do, but it is up to the will to determine which alternative--out of all those the intellect has identified as possibilities--the agent acts upon. Scotus also agrees with Aquinas that human beings cannot will misery for its own sake, but he denies that this implies that human beings are necessitated to choose happiness. On Scotus's account, human beings choose happiness if they choose anything at all and they cannot will against happiness, but they nevertheless can fail to will happiness.

5. Conclusion

Thinkers throughout the Middle Ages found the topics of action and free will compelling for many of the same reasons why they remain of perennial interest today. Philosophers find them interesting in their own right as well as recognizing their implications for moral responsibility, the concept of personhood, and such important religious issues as the problem of evil and the tension with divine omniscience. The general character of many medieval theories of free will is voluntarist in nature, with the views of Albert the Great and Thomas Aquinas the most significant departures from this trend.

The accounts of Thomas Aquinas and of John Duns Scotus are useful paradigms to illustrate some of the advantages and disadvantages of voluntarist and intellectualist approaches to action and its freedom. We have seen that the determinant nature of our beliefs raises a problem for Aquinas's location of freedom in the intellect. Aquinas also has a harder time explaining cases of weakness of will (that is, cases where an agent recognizes the better choice but chooses the lesser one). These cases are tough for Aquinas to explain because they seem to involve a judgment that a particular action is the better thing to do, yet the agent chooses not to perform that action. Instead, the agent chooses some other action that the agent is willing to grant is worse. Scotus has a much easier time accommodating these cases, since for him, the will is never necessitated by a judgment of intellect. Yet his theory faces an important objection: the arbitrariness objection. Because there is no tight connection between intellect and will on Scotus's account, the will is never determined by the judgment of intellect. Therefore, it is always possible for the will either to will in accordance with the intellect's judgment or against it. This situation raises the question: why does the agent choose as she does? It can't be because the intellect made a particular judgment, for the will is not determined by that judgment. Scotus argues that there is no further explanation for the will's choice; the will simply chooses. But then the will's choice and the agent's subsequent action become very mysterious. Thus, Scotus loses a rational grounding for understanding why an agent acts as she does. He can no longer appeal to an agent's reasons for acting one way rather than another, for those reasons do not determine the agent's choice. Because Aquinas maintains a tight connection between the intellect's judgment and the will's choice, he does not face this particular objection and can maintain what is known as a reasons-explanation for action. In the end, what is an advantage for the one theory becomes a difficulty for the other, and vice versa.

See also the article Foreknowledge and Free Will in this encyclopedia.

6. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Albert the Great. Opera Omnia. Augustus Borgnet, ed., Paris: Vives, 1890-9.
    • Unfortunately, the works of Albert the Great are not yet widely available in translation.
  • Albert the Great. Opera Omnia. Bernhard Geyer et al, eds. Bonn: Institum Alerti Magni, 1951-.
    • A newer and currently incomplete edition of Albert's works.
  • Anselm of Canterbury. Three Philosophical Dialogues. Thomas Williams, trans. Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Co., 2002.
    • This book includes Anselm's treatises, On Freedom of Choice and On the Fall of the Devil.
  • Anselm of Canterbury. Truth, Freedom, and Evil. Jasper Hopkins and Herbert Richardson, trans. New York: Harper and Row, 1965.
    • This book includes Anselm's treatises, On Freedom of Choice and On the Fall of the Devil.
  • Aquinas, Thomas. Summa theologiae. Fathers of the English Dominican Province, trans. Allen, TX: Christian Classics, 1981 (reprint).
  • Aquinas, Thomas. Treatise on Happiness. John A. Oesterle, trans. Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press, 1964.
    • This book consists of the twenty-one questions from Summa theologiae that have to do with the human ultimate end, and human action and its freedom.
  • Augustine. On Free Choice of the Will. Thomas Williams, trans. Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Co., 1993.
  • Bernard of Clairvaux. On Grace and Free Choice. Daniel O'Donovan, trans. Kalamazoo, MI: Cistercian Publications, Inc., 1988.
  • Lombard, Peter. Sententiae in IV libris distinctae. Ignatius Brady, ed. Grottoferrata: Editiones Colegii S.Bonaventurae ad Claras Aquas, 1971-81.
  • Lombard, Peter. The Sentences Book 2: On Creation. Mediaeval Sources in Translation. Giulio Silano,trans. Toronto: PIMS, 2008.
    • The question on liberum arbitrium is found in book two, distinction 24.
  • Scotus, John Duns. Duns Scotus on the Will and Morality. Allan B. Wolter, O.F.M., trans. William A Frank, ed. Washington, DC: Catholic University of America Press, 1997.
    • This is a reprint of an earlier (1986) edition in which the Latin text found in the 1986 edition has been removed. In addition to primary texts, it contains commentary by Wolter.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Alexander, Archibald. Theories of the Will in the History of Philosophy. New York: Scribner, 1898.
  • Bourke, Vernon J. Will in Western Thought. New York: Sheed and Ward, 1964.
  • Chappell, T.D.J. Aristotle and Augustine on Freedom: Two Theories of Freedom Voluntary Action, and Akrasia. New York: St. Martin's Press, 1995.
  • Colish, Marcia. Peter Lombard. Leiden: E.J. Brill, 1994.
  • Davies, Brian, ed. Aquinas's Summa Theologiae: Critical Essays. Lanham: Rowman and Littlefield, 2006.
    • Contains some essays on action and freedom.
  • Matthews, Gareth B., ed. The Augustinian Tradition. Berkeley: University of California Press, 1999.
    • A collection of essays on Augustine, some of which deal with his theory of will and freedom.
  • Matthews, Gareth B. Augustine. Blackwell Publishing, 2005.
  • McCluskey, Colleen. "Intellective Appetite and the Freedom of Human Action." The Thomist 66 (2002): 421-56.
    • A defense of Aquinas's theory of freedom against criticisms raised by Thomas Williams in the article listed below from The Thomist.
  • McCluskey, Colleen. "Worthy Constraints in Albertus Magnus's Theory of Action." Journal of the History of Philosophy 39 (2001):491-533.
  • MacDonald, Scott, and Stump, Eleonore, eds. Aquinas's Moral Theory: Essays in Honor of Norman Kretzmann. Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1999.
    • This book includes essays on Aquinas's theory of the passions as well as his account of practical reasoning.
  • Pope, Stephen J., ed. The Ethics of Aquinas. Washington, DC: Georgetown University Press, 2002.
    • This book contains essays on Aquinas's theory of action and freedom as well as his ethics. It is organized around the specific questions in Summa theologiae that deal with these issues.
  • Rogers, Katherin. "Anselm on Grace and Free Will." The Saint Anselm Journal 2 (2005): 66-72.
  • Stump, Eleonore. Aquinas. London: Routledge, 2003.
    • A broad discussion of Aquinas's views, including his theory of action and freedom.
  • Westberg, Daniel. Right Practical Reason: Aristotle, Action, and Prudence in Aquinas. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1994.
  • Williams, Thomas and Visser, Sandra. "Anselm's Account of Freedom." Canadian Journal of Philosophy 31 (2001): 221-244.
  • Williams, Thomas. "The Libertarian Foundations of Scotus's Moral Philosophy." The Thomist (1998): 193-215.
    • This article also contains a criticism of Aquinas's theory of freedom.
  • Williams, Thomas. "How Scotus Separates Morality from Happiness." American Catholic Philosophical Quarterly 69 (1995): 425-445.

Author Information

Colleen McClusky
Saint Louis University
U. S. A.

John Duns Scotus (1266–1308)

duns-ScotusJohn Duns Scotus, along with Bonaventure, Aquinas, and Ockham, is one of the four great philosophers of High Scholasticism. His work is encyclopedic in scope, yet so detailed and nuanced that he earned the epithet “Subtle Doctor,” and no less a thinker than Ockham would praise his judgment as excelling all others in its subtlety. In opposition to the prevailing thought in metaphysics that the term “being” is analogical, Scotus argues that it must be a univocal term, a view others had feared would bring an end to metaphysics and natural theology. Scotus’s novel account of universals and individuation gained a wide following and inspired brilliant counterarguments by Ockham and Thomist opponents. Despite its flaws, his argument for God’s existence, perhaps the most complicated of any ever written, is a philosophical tour de force. Scotus’s distinction between intuitive and abstractive cognition structured much of the discussion of cognition for the rest of the scholastic period. In opposition to such thinkers as Aquinas and Godfrey of Fontaines, Scotus defends a moderate voluntarism in his account of free will, a view that would be influential into the modern period.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Works
    1. Life
    2. Works
  2. The Subject of Metaphysics
  3. Distinctions
  4. Universals
  5. Individuation
  6. The Argument for God’s Existence
  7. Univocity, Metaphysics, and Natural Theology
    1. Background
    2. Problems Arising from Analogy and Equivocity
    3. Arguments for Univocity
  8. Cognition
    1. Intuitive and Abstractive Cognition
    2. Divine Illumination and Skepticism
  9. Natural Law
  10. Action Theory and Will
  11. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Texts in Latin
    2. Primary Texts in English Translation
    3. Secondary Literature

1. Life and Works

a. Life

No one knows precisely when John Duns was born, but we are fairly certain he came from the eponymous town of Duns near the Scottish border with England. He, like many other of his compatriots, was called “Scotus,” or “the Scot,” from the country of his birth. He was ordained a priest on 17 March 1291. Because his bishop had just ordained another group at the end of 1290, we can place Scotus’s birth in the first quarter of 1266, if he was ordained as early as canon law permitted. When he was a boy he joined the Franciscans, who sent him to study at Oxford, probably in 1288. He was still at Oxford in 1300, for he took part in a disputation there at some point in 1300 or 1301, once he had finished lecturing on the Sentences. Moreover, when the English provincial presented 22 names to Bishop Dalderby on 26 July 1300 for licenses to hear confessions at Oxford, Scotus’s was among them. He probably completed his Oxford studies in 1301. He was not, however, incepted as a master at Oxford, for his provincial sent him to the more prestigious University of Paris, where he would lecture on the Sentences a second time.

The longstanding rift between Pope Boniface VIII and King Philip the Fair of France would soon shake the University of Paris and interrupt Scotus’s studies. In June of 1301, Philip’s emissaries examined each Franciscan at the Parisian convent, separating the royalists from the papists. Supporters of the Pope, a slight majority that included Scotus, were given three days to leave France. Scotus returned to Paris by the fall of 1304, after Boniface had died and the new Pope, Benedict XI, had made his peace with Philip. We are not sure where Scotus spent his exile, but it seems probable that he returned to work at Oxford. Scotus also lectured at Cambridge some time after he completed his studies at Oxford, but scholars are uncertain about exactly when.

Scotus completed his Parisian studies and was incepted as a master, probably in early 1305. As regent master, he held a set of quodlibetal questions (his only set) within two years of his inception. His order transferred him to the Franciscan house of studies at Cologne, where we know he served as lector in 1307. He died the next year; the date traditionally given is 8 November. Pope John Paul II proclaimed his beatification in 1993.

b. Works

Scholars have made considerable progress in determining which of the works attributed to Scotus are genuine. Moreover, many key texts now exist in critical editions: the philosophical works in the St. Bonaventure edition, and the theological works in the Vatican edition. However, others have not yet been edited critically. The Wadding Opera omnia is not a critical edition, and the reliability of the texts varies considerably. Despite its title, Wadding’s Opera omnia does not contain quite all of Scotus’s works. Most importantly, what Wadding includes as the Paris Reportatio on Book 1 of the Sentences is actually Book 1 of the Additiones magnae, William of Alnwick’s compilation of Scotus’s thought based largely but not exclusively on his Parisian teaching. The Parisian Reportatio exists in several versions, but most of it only in manuscript. Scholars are still uncertain about the exact chronology of the works.

Early in his career, Scotus wrote a number of logical works: questions on Porphyry’s Isagoge and on Aristotle’s Categories, On Interpretation, and Sophistical Refutations. His Oxford lectures on the Sentences are recorded in his Lectura, and his disputations at Oxford are recorded in the first set of his Collations. Scotus probably began his Questions on the Metaphysics in the early stages of his career as well, but recent scholarship suggests that Scotus composed parts of this work, in particular on Books VII-IX, after he left England for Paris, and perhaps late in his career. Scotus also wrote an Expositio on Aristotle’s Metaphysics and a set of questions on Aristotle’s On the Soul, but more study is needed to determine their relationship with the rest of Scotus’s corpus.

While still at Oxford, Scotus began reworking the Lectura into his Ordinatio, a fuller, more sophisticated commentary on the Sentences. At some point, probably after writing Book 1 d.5, Scotus departed for Paris, where he continued his work on the Ordinatio, incorporating into later sections material from his Parisian lectures on the Sentences. These Parisian lectures exist only in various versions of student reports, and so are called the Reportatio Parisiensis. Scotus’s early disputations at Paris are recorded in the second set of his Collations. After his inception as master, he held one set of Quodlibetal Questions. Scotus’s Logica, which Wadding’s edition mistakenly includes as Question 1 of Quaestiones miscellaneae de formalitatibus (although Scotus wrote no such work), is a brief but important investigation of what follows from the claim that a and b are not formally identical, and supplements discussions of the formal distinction in the Reportatio and the Ordinatio. Scotus composed his famous treatise De primo principio late in his career. While it cannibalizes large chunks of the Ordinatio, it is nevertheless Scotus’s most mature treatment of the central claims of natural theology. Scholars are still uncertain whether one further work, the Theoremata, is genuine.

Scotus died just a few years after his inception, leaving behind a mass of works he had intended to complete or polish for publication. Nevertheless, he soon exercised as great an influence as any other thinker from the High Scholastic Period, including Bonaventure and Aquinas. Despite fierce opposition from many quarters, and in particular from Scotus’s admiring confrere William Ockham, the Scotist school flourished well into the seventeenth century, where his influence can be seen in such writers as Descartes and Bramhall. Interest in Scotus’s philosophy dwindled in the eighteenth century, and when nineteenth century philosophers and theologians again grew interested in scholastic thought, they generally turned to Aquinas and his followers, not to Scotus. However, the Franciscans continuously attested to Scotus’s importance, and in the twentieth century their efforts sparked a revival of interest in Scotus, which has engendered many studies of high quality as well as a critical edition of Scotus’s writing, eleven volumes of which are now in print. It remains to be seen whether Scotus’s thought will have as great an impact on contemporary philosophy as Aquinas’s or Anselm’s.

2. The Subject of Metaphysics

The medieval debate over the subject matter of metaphysics stems from various proposals in Aristotle’s Metaphysics. These include being qua being (Met. 4.1), God (Met. 6.1), and substance (Met. 7.1). The Islamic philosophers Avicenna and Averroes, powerful influences on Christian scholastic philosophy, are divided on the issue. Avicenna rejects the contention that God is the subject of metaphysics on the grounds that no science can establish the existence of its own subject, while metaphysics can demonstrate God’s existence. He argues instead that the subject of metaphysics is being qua being. We have a common notion of being applicable to God, substances, and accidents, and this notion makes possible a science of being qua being that includes God and separated substances as well as material substances and accidents. In his rejoinder to Avicenna, Averroes holds that the view that metaphysics studies being qua being amounts to the view that metaphysics studies substance and, in particular, separated substances and God. Because it is physics, and not the nobler discipline of metaphysics that establishes God’s existence, there is no bar to holding that God is the subject of metaphysics. Scotus maintains with Avicenna that metaphysics studies being qua being. Of course, among beings, God is preeminent: He is the only perfect being, the being on which all others depend. These facts explain why God occupies the most important place in metaphysics. However, what makes God a proper subject for metaphysics is not that he is God, but that he is a being. Metaphysics also includes the study of the transcendentals, which “transcend” the Aristotelian scheme of the categories. The transcendentals include being, the proper attributes of being (“one,” “true,” and “good” are transcendental terms, because they are coextensive with “being,” each signifying one of being’s proper attributes), and what is signified by disjunctions that are coextensive with “being,” such as “finite or infinite” and “necessary or contingent.” However, anything capable of real existence also falls under the heading of “being qua being” and so may be studied in metaphysics.

3. Distinctions

On Scotus’s view, in order to have an accurate grasp of the structure of created reality and the nature of God, and in order to answer such questions as what individuates substances or how a God with multiple attributes can still be simple, we must first have a clear understanding of the various sorts of identity and distinction that hold among items. What follows is a brief taxonomy of four key sorts of identity and distinction, with particular emphasis on formal identity and distinction, earmarks of Scotistic philosophy. For simplicity’s sake, I will speak below only of distinction and not identity.

1. A real distinction holds between two individuals, x and y, if and only if it is logically possible either for x to exist without y or for y to exist without x. For example, Ricky the cat and Beulah the cow are really distinct, as are your hand and your foot, and a substance and its accident such as Socrates and his paleness. In these examples, either x or y in each pair can exist without the other. Even the paleness can exist without Socrates, although only by divine power. However, God and any creature are really distinct, and while God can exist without any creature, no creature can exist without God. Hence for real distinction it is not necessary that both items in the pair be able to exist without the other.

2. A conceptual distinction results from intellectual activity and does not mark any distinction in the thing itself. Rather, our intellects create distinct conceptions of what is really the same. For instance, to adapt Frege’s famous example, our concept of the Morning Star is distinct from our concept of the Evening Star, and yet the Morning Star and Evening Star are really one and the same thing: the planet Venus.

3. Scotus recognizes the need for a distinction that lies between the real and the conceptual distinction, a distinction that has a foundation in reality and so is mind-independent and yet does not imply real separability. For example, the will and the intellect are really the same, for each is really identical with and inseparable from the soul. However, the will is a free power and the intellect is not, and this is not simply a matter of the way we conceive them. Some sort of less than real but more than conceptual distinction is needed to capture this fact. Scotus calls this sort of distinction the formal distinction. What are distinguished in this case are not things (res) but what Scotus calls “formalities” or “realities” or “entities” in one and the same thing. According to Scotus, x and y are formally distinct if and only if (a) x and y are really the same and (b) x has a different ratio (account or character) than y, and (c) neither ratio overlaps the other. So, although the will and the intellect are really identical, their accounts differ and are mutually non-inclusive, and so they are formally distinct. Likewise, there is a formal distinction between the common nature and the individuator, between a genus and specific difference, between the divine attributes, and between each Person of the Trinity and the Divine Essence.

Scholars are widely agreed that in his early work, at least in the Lectura, when Scotus speaks of distinct formalities in a single thing, he means to identify items that are ontologically robust enough to serve as property bearers. Hence, Scotus can explain a single thing’s having even contradictory properties F and not-F without running afoul of the Principle of Non-Contradiction by contending that the bearer of F is a distinct formality from the bearer of not-F, although the two formalities are really identical. For instance, human nature is common both in itself and in reality, while the individuator that contracts that common nature into Socrates is individual of itself, even though in Socrates the common nature and the individuator are really the same.

In some of his Parisian works, such as the Reportatio (notably 1 d.33) and Logica, Scotus appears to grow more ontologically parsimonious, holding that formal non-identity or distinction within a single thing does not imply absolutely distinct formalities in that thing. Gelber [1974] and Adams [1976] suggest that Scotus changes his mind in response to criticisms his teaching on the formal distinction may have sustained at Paris. Scotus’s mediaeval critics, writing after his death, warned that his account would ruin the doctrine of divine simplicity if indeed it posited a plurality of formalities in God. However, it is hard to tell whether Scotus did in fact change his mind. Both the Reportatio and the Logica maintain that if x and y are formally distinct, that implies that they are not absolutely but only qualifiedly distinct, for they have only a diminished sort of distinction. It is hard to tell from what Scotus writes, however, whether this diminished distinction is sufficient for allowing qualifiedly distinct formalities to bear properties. There is also some evidence that Scotus raises the same ontological cautions about formalities in his Oxford writings (see the admittedly ambiguous Ordinatio 1 d.2 p.2 q.1-4 nn.404-8), independently of any Parisian criticism targeted at his work.

4. Scotus recognizes yet another sort of extramental distinction, one that applies to such items as the color red, which can be deeper or paler, courage, which can be stronger or weaker, and being, which can be finite or infinite. These items vary in the degree, quantity, or intensity of their perfection, that is, in their intrinsic mode. Scotus calls the distinction between such an item and its intrinsic mode a modal distinction, explaining its difference from the formal distinction by contrasting intrinsic modes with differentiae. Each differentia contracting the genus virtue (for instance) into its various species has a different formal character from its genus. However, variations in the depth of one’s courage do not create new species any more than do variations in the intensity of red, in the strength of one’s desire, or in degree of being. Pale red and deep red share the same formal character, as do slight and powerful desires for the same object; they differ only in the degree or intensity with which they exhibit this character. The modal distinction, then, is an even lesser one than the formal distinction.

4. Universals

Medieval philosophers rely heavily on ontological classificatory systems—in particular, systems inspired by Aristotle’s Categories—to show key relations among created beings and to afford us scientific knowledge of them. The individuals Socrates and Plato belong to the species human being, which in turn belongs to the genus animal. Donkeys likewise belong to the genus animal, but the difference rational divides humans from other animals. The genus animal, along with other genera such as plant, belongs to the category of substance. That much is uncontroversial. What mediaeval philosophers debate, however, is the ontological status of these genera and species. Do they exist in extramental reality, or are they merely concepts? If they do have extramental existence, what sort of existence is it? Are genera and species constituents of individuals, or are they separated from individuals? It is with these questions in mind that Scotus articulates his account of common natures. In short, he will argue that common natures such as humanity and animality really exist (although they have a “lesser” existence than individuals), that they are common both in themselves and in reality, and that they combine with individuators, which “contract” them.

The chief obstacle to accepting Scotus’s account of common natures is that his view requires us to accept that there are realites—genera and species—that have a less than numerical unity. Accordingly, Scotus offers a battery of arguments for the conclusion that not all real unity is numerical unity. In one of the stronger arguments, Scotus contends that if all real unity were numerical unity, then all real diversity would likewise be numerical diversity. However, any two numerically diverse things are, as such, equally diverse. In that case, Socrates would be just as diverse from Plato as he is from a line. Our intellects could not, then, abstract anything common from Socrates and Plato. In that case, when we apply the universal concept human being to the two of them, we would apply a mere fiction of our intellects. These absurd consequences show that numerical diversity is not the only sort, and since numerical diversity is the greatest diversity, there must be a real but less than numerical diversity and a real but less than numerical unity corresponding to it. Another argument holds that even if there were no intellects to cognize it, fire would still generate fire. The generating fire and the generated fire would have real unity of form, the sort of unity that would make this a case of univocal causation. The two instances of fire, then, have a mind-independent common nature with a less than numerical unity.

Although common natures are not in themselves individuals, since their proper unity is less than numerical, they are not in themselves universals, either. Following Aristotle, Scotus holds that what is universal is what is one in many and said of many. As Scotus understands this account, a universal F must have the indifference to be predicable in a first mode predication statement of individual Fs in such a way that the universal and each particular are identical. As Cross points out [2002], the sort of identity at work here is representational: The universal F represents each individual F equally well. Scotus contends that no common nature can be universal in this way. True, a common nature has a certain sort of indifference: It is not incompatible with any common nature that it be contracted by some individuator other than the one that does in fact contract it. However, with the exception of the Divine Essence, which is predicable of each Divine Person, only a concept has the indifference to be predicable in the way a universal is predicable.

Although Scotus originates this distinction between universals and common natures, he finds his inspiration for it in Avicenna’s famous assertion that “horseness is just horseness.” As Scotus understands this claim, common natures are indifferent to individuality or universality. Although they cannot actually exist except as individuated or as universal, they are not individuated or universal of themselves. For this reason Scotus characterizes universality and individuality as accidental to the common nature and, therefore, as needing a cause. It is the intellect that causes the common nature to be universal by conceptualizing it under the mode of universality, that is, in such a way that numerically one concept is predicable of a plurality of individuals.

This account of really existing common natures that bear a certain priority over individuals might suggest that Scotus is reworking a Platonic theory of Forms. However, Scotus distances his own account from Plato’s. For one thing, Plato holds that the Forms are the highest realities, while the particular things that participate them are lesser realities. Although Scotus admits that common natures really exist—they have their own being (esse)—because they have a less than numerical unity, they have a correspondingly diminished being. Individuals, in contrast, have numerical unity, and so their being is not diminished: The individual Socrates has more being than the common nature humanity instantiated in him. Furthermore, Plato maintains that the Forms exist independently of the individuals that participate them and of the minds that think them. On Scotus’s view, common natures exist only as constituents of individuals in extramental reality or as concepts in the mind. It is true that among the constituents of an individual, the common nature has a certain natural priority over the individuator: The nature is common not only of itself, but even in reality. Even when it forms a composition with an individuator, there is nothing incompatible about its forming a composition with a different individuator. However, this natural priority does not imply that the common nature can exist independently of its individuator, and so Scotus is correct to distinguish his account from Plato’s. Although Scotus’s important disciple Francis of Meyronnes took pains to liken Scotus’s views to Plato’s, he did so largely by interpreting Plato as a Scotist, not by interpreting Scotus as a Platonist.

5. Individuation

Humanity is a common nature instantiated in both Socrates and Plato. Socrates and Plato, in contrast, are not instantiated in anything further. Scotus calls them “individuals” and “singulars” because they cannot be divided or instantiated the way humanity is. To put the matter another way, Socrates and Plato cannot be divided into subjective parts. What explains their individuality, however, is a matter of vibrant controversy among scholastic philosophers, and Scotus comes to his own influential answer to the question by investigating the merits and flaws of his predecessors’ answers.

Many of these predecessors, such as Aquinas, explain the individuation of material and immaterial substances differently. Accordingly, Scotus begins with a critical refutation of their views on the individuation of material substances and follows this with an account of individuation, applicable to both material and immaterial creatures, that avoids the criticisms plaguing these other views. His first move is to argue that material substance is not individual on the basis of its nature. As we’ve seen (see Section 4), such natures as humanity and assinity are common and have a less than numerical unity, so there must be something besides the nature that explains the individuality of Socrates or Brownie the donkey.

That explanation, according to Henry of Ghent, Scotus’s favorite foil, is a double negation. The first negation is vertical, so to speak. If the item has no subjective parts, that is, if there is nothing further into which it can be divided in the ways that animal and human being are divisible in this Porphyrian tree


then the condition of vertical negation is satisfied. The second negation is horizontal: The item is non-identical with anything “beside” it in the same species. Because Plato and Socrates satisfy both of these conditions, they are individuals.

Scotus objects that Henry’s account is, at best, incomplete. It is true that negations can be explanatory in some cases. Pierre’s absence from the café explains why I do not see him when I arrive there, for instance. However, in the case at issue, resolving the problem requires accounting for a thing’s formal incompatibility with instantiation (having subjective parts), and only a positive feature can explain a formal incompatibility. Moreover, appealing to a double negation only moves the question at issue one stage back. If a material individual cannot be further instantiated because of the double negation, we will still not have a full answer until we discover what explains why it has this double negation, and an answer to that question must appeal to something positive.

The most common scholastic views, espoused by such influential thinkers as Thomas Aquinas, Giles of Rome, and Godfrey of Fontaines, do explain the individuation of substances by appeal to something positive, such as actual existence, quantity, or matter. Scotus heaps arguments against each of these views, but here I will recount one argument aimed equally against all three of these candidates.

Because substance is naturally prior to accident, what explains a thing’s being in any hierarchical substantial ordering must itself be in the category of substance. For instance, Plato is an individual in the species human, in the genus animal. No accident can explain any of these features. The addition of accidents to the species human, for instance, would not produce any individual human, but just an accidental union of the substance human being and those accidents. Scotus lodges largely the same criticism against the view that actual existence individuates, since actual existence too is extrinsic to any creature’s nature and, therefore, accidental to it. Finally, although matter counts as substance and not accident, Scotus’ predecessors argued that it is not matter per se, but matter marked by quantity that individuates, and so Scotus understands the theory that matter individuates as likewise holding that an accident, at least partly, explains the individuation of substance.

The critical discussion of his predecessors leads Scotus to conclude that what explains a substance’s individuation must be something positive and intrinsic to what it individuates. Moreover, it cannot be something common, since what is common can exist in something other than what it in fact exists in, while what explains individuation cannot. Finally, it must fall into the category of substance, since when the individuator is added, the substance is complete. It is the final element in a substance’s metaphysical make-up. Scotus often draws a useful analogy between the individuator and the specific difference. The specific difference rational cannot be divided, and so when it combines with the genus animal to constitute the species human being, the species is indivisible into further species. Likewise, Socrates’s individuator combines with the common nature human to constitute the individual Socrates, who cannot be instantiated. The individuator adds nothing further to his essence, which his common nature fully contains: While it makes him Socrates, it does not make him human. Although Scotus’s account of this individuator appears to remain constant in his many writings, what he calls it varies across works and even within single works. He frequently speaks of it as “the individual entity,” but also as “the individual form” and as “the haecceity.” Perhaps because of its use by C.S. Pierce, this last term has become dominant in contemporary discussions of Scotus on individuation.

6. The Argument for God’s Existence

Although God is not the object of metaphysics, he is nevertheless its goal: Proving the existence and nature of God is what metaphysics aims at. Scotus offers several versions of his proof of God’s existence, all sufficiently similar in language, structure, and strategy to be discussed together. The summary below will not do justice to this argument, perhaps the most complex in all scholastic philosophy. In what follows, the argument’s structure is broadly sketched and some details are furnished of its most important and distinctive subordinate arguments.

Scotus’s argument unfolds in four stages:

A. There is (1) a first efficient cause, (2) a preeminent being, (3) a first final cause.

B. Only one nature is first in these three ways.

C. A nature that is first in any of these ways is infinite.

D. There is only one infinite being.

Scotus’s argument begins in a distinctive way. At stage A, he incorporates various strategies his predecessors used for proving God’s existence into a stage of his single proof: (1) There is a first efficient cause that produced all else but is itself unproduced; (2) there is a preeminent being, one whose nature surpasses all others; and (3) there is a first final cause or ultimate end. At stage B, Scotus argues that a being that has any one of these three primacies will have the other two as well. At stage C, he proves that a being with any of these primacies is intensively infinite. Finally, at D he concludes that there cannot be more than one being with this triple primacy. Since Christianity identifies God as the creator of all but himself, as the being whose causal powers sustain the universe, as the preeminent nature who is infinitely good, wise, and powerful, and as the ultimate end of all things, Scotus identifies the unique being whose existence he takes himself to have proved as the Christian God.

Much of the argument’s interest lies in the subordinate arguments for A1, partly because they serve as the foundation for the rest of the proof, and partly because of their intrinsic philosophical interest. Relying on the common scholastic assumptions that (a) no being can produce itself, (b) there cannot be a circle of productive causes, and (c) every production has some cause, Scotus argues as follows:

Argument I: The Non-Modal Argument for a First Efficient Cause

1. Some being x is produced.

2. x is produced by some other being y.

3. Either y is an unproduced, first producer or is a posterior producer.

4. A series of produced producers cannot proceed interminably.

5. Therefore,
the series stops at an unproduced producer, a first efficient cause that produces independently.

Thus far, Scotus’s argument is typical of those found in scholastic philosophy. However, as he recognizes, philosophers such as Aristotle think that infinite causal series are possible, and so premise (4) appears to beg the question. Scotus’s defense of this vulnerable premise brings a clarity and articulateness to the discussion of infinite causal regression that his predecessors never could muster. Scotus concedes that there can indeed be an infinite accidentally ordered series of produced producers, but there cannot be an infinite essentially ordered series of produced producers, and this latter is all he needs to establish to reach his conclusion. In an accidentally ordered series of causes, in which A causes B and B causes C, B depends on A to bring it into existence, but it does not depend on A in order to be the cause of C. For instance, even if Ricky the cat depended on Furry to sire him, Ricky may now sire kittens himself without any causal contribution from Furry. When philosophers admitted the possibility of infinite causal regresses, it is only accidentally ordered series they had in mind. On the other hand, in an essentially ordered series of causes, B depends on A in order to be the cause of C. For instance, on the mediaeval science that Scotus accepts, a human being depends on the sun’s causal activity to generate another human.

From this key difference between accidentally and essentially ordered causal series, two further differences follow. In an accidentally ordered series, A need not act (or even exist) simultaneously with B in order for B to cause C. Furry may be long dead, and yet his son Ricky can sire kittens. In an essentially ordered series, however, A must exist and act at the very time B produces C. Secondly, in an accidentally ordered series, the causes may be of the same nature (ratio) and order (ordo), while in an essentially ordered series the causes belong to a different nature and order. After all, cause A does not simply bring B into existence, as Furry does Ricky; nor does it make a partial causal contribution, the way Brownie the donkey does when he is hitched to a wagon together with Eeyore. Cause A’s current causal contribution is what explains the fact that B is capable of causing C. However, being of a different nature and order does not imply that A is a higher sort of being than B. Because he is alive, Ricky the cat is a higher nature than the inanimate sun, even if the sun, as a more universal cause, belongs to a different order.

Scotus offers several arguments for the conclusion that there must be a first efficient cause of an essentially ordered series, all of them problematic. In one, he argues as follows:

Argument II

1. If there were an infinite series of essentially ordered causes, the totality of things effected would depend on some prior cause.

2. Nothing can be an essentially ordered cause of itself.

3. If this prior cause were part of the totality of things effected, it would be an essentially ordered cause of itself.

4. Even if there were an infinite series of essentially ordered causes, the totality of things effected would be effected by a cause outside the totality.

This argument does not purport to establish that an infinite series of essentially ordered causes is impossible, but rather that even if there were such a series, there must be a first efficient cause of that series that lies outside the series. However, without further assumptions, the argument does not quite reach its goal: It concludes not that there is a first efficient cause, but only that there is an efficient cause prior to this totality.

Scotus’s most original argument is the following:

Argument III

1. Being possessed of efficient causal power does not necessarily imply imperfection.

2. It is possible that something possesses efficient causal power without imperfection.

3. If nothing possesses efficient causal power without dependence on something prior, then nothing has efficient causal power without imperfection.

4. It is possible that some nature possesses independent efficient causal power.

5. A nature that possesses independent efficient causal power is absolutely first.

6. It is possible that there be an absolutely first efficient causal power.

Like goodness and wisdom, efficient causal power is a pure perfection, and so it is possible for something to have efficient causal power without imperfection. Because dependence is an imperfection, it is possible for something to have independent causal power. This being would not be a link in an essentially ordered series of causes, but would stand at the head of the series as absolutely first. At this stage, however, Scotus has established only the possibility of an absolutely first efficient causal power. That is because he will use this conclusion as the key premise in another version of his argument for God’s existence, in which he will try to demonstrate that an absolutely first efficient causal power actually exists.

Argument IV: The Modal Version

In another objection to what he has written so far, Scotus notes that his argument for a first efficient cause, even if sound, does not count as a genuine demonstration because its premises are merely contingent, even if they are evident. If an argument is to lead us to scientia, the highest form of knowledge, it must be demonstrative: It must contain necessary premises leading to a necessary conclusion. In reply, Scotus offers a reformulated modal argument constructed with necessarily true premises. Scotus reworks his entire non-modal argument for a first efficient cause, but he also notes that we may begin with the conclusion of Argument III:

6. It is possible that there be an absolutely first efficient causal power.

7. If a being A cannot exist from another, then if it is possible that A exist, A exists independently.

8. An absolutely first efficient cause cannot exist from another.

9. An absolutely first efficient cause exists independently.

If an absolutely first efficient cause did not in fact exist, there would be no real possibility of its existing. After all, since it is absolutely first, it is impossible for it to depend on any other cause. Because there is a real possibility of its existing, it follows that it exists of itself.

7. Univocity, Metaphysics, and Natural Theology

a. Background

Once he opts for the view that being qua being is the subject of metaphysics, Scotus argues further that the concept of being must apply univocally to anything studied by metaphysics. If the concept of being applied only equivocally to a group of objects, it would not have the unity necessary to serve as the subject of a single science. It does not help to follow the lead of Aquinas or Henry of Ghent and argue that the concept of being applies to the objects of metaphysics analogously, because in Scotus’s view, analogy is just a form of equivocity. If the concept of being applies to metaphysics’ diverse objects by analogy, in that case too metaphysics cannot be a unified science.

Scotus offers two conditions for a concept’s being univocal: (1) affirming and denying it of one and the same subject is sufficient for a contradiction, and (2) it can serve as the middle term of a syllogism. For example, we can say without contradiction that Karen’s sitting on the jury was voluntary (because she willed to go to court rather than to be fined) and that her sitting on the jury was not voluntary (because she felt pressured into service). In this case, we do not reach a contradiction because the concept voluntary is equivocal. Likewise, the syllogism

No inanimate objects are unfriendly.
Some photocopiers are unfriendly.
Therefore, Some photocopiers are animate.

reaches an absurd conclusion because the term “unfriendly” is used equivocally: While it is used literally in the first premise, it is used in a figure of speech in the second.

b. Problems Arising from Analogy and Equivocity

Scotus finds that unless the concept of being is univocal, both philosophy and natural theology come to ruin, a startling claim in light of the fact that the prevailing mediaeval view up to that time was that philosophy and theology would come to ruin if the concept of being was univocal. Mediaeval philosophers before Scotus commonly thought that the concept of being must be not univocal or equivocal, but analogical: While it is not a pure accident that it applies to such diverse items as donkeys (substances) and dispositions (stubbornness), as well as to both creatures and God, it nevertheless does not apply to these diverse items in the same way. If it did, then being would be a genus, and the various Aristotelian categories would not be fundamentally diverse, but just different species of a single genus. Aristotelian ontology, the foundation of mediaeval philosophy since Alcuin, would have to be scrapped and a new ontology developed to replace it.

The consequences for natural theology would be even direr. Without a univocal concept of being, it would be impossible to construct an a posteriori argument for God’s existence, one that took as its premises facts about the existence of finite creatures. Moreover, unless other concepts besides that of being are univocally applicable to God and creatures, then the sort of philosophical theology exemplified by Anselm and the scholastic thinkers who followed him, meant not just to establish God’s existence but to elucidate his nature, would be impossible. Their universal practice is to discover God’s nature—what God is like in himself—by determining which perfections are pure perfections, perfections that imply no limitation whatsoever. An absolutely perfect God must have all pure perfections and only pure perfections, and so any attribute implying limitation does not characterize God as he is in himself. To determine which are the pure perfections, philosophical theologians use some version of this principle, which has its roots in Anselm (Monologion 15): F is a pure perfection if and only if it is in every respect better to be F than what is incompatible with F. Accordingly, because goodness, wisdom, and power satisfy this criterion for pure perfection, while corporeality and mobility do not, God is good, wise, and powerful, but not corporeal and mobile. However, no one can use the Anselmian criterion to determine what God is like without using concepts that apply univocally to God and creatures.

Scotus explains why this is so in the course of the Ordinatio’s fourth argument for univocity. Either the account of a pure perfection is (a) proper to creatures and inapplicable to God, (b) proper to God and inapplicable to creatures, or (c) univocally applicable to God and creatures. On the first option, whatever pure perfections one discovers by the Anselmian criterion are applicable only to creatures and not to God, a view Scotus finds absurd, presumably because God would not then be the most perfect of all beings possible. The second option, however, entirely rules out using the Anselmian criterion to discover the divine nature. If pure perfections are proper to God, then we must determine which attributes are pure perfections by seeing whether or not God has them. In contrast, to use the Anselmian criterion, one first determines whether or not an attribute is a pure perfection and only then concludes whether it is applicable to God. Options (a) and (b) bring natural theology to a halt because they preclude the use of the Anselmian criterion to discover God’s nature, but no such problems arise if our concepts of pure perfections apply univocally to God and creatures.

In the generation before Scotus, Henry of Ghent, moved by many of the same considerations, had articulated his own unique solution to these problems, a solution that would form the starting point for Scotus’s discussion. On Henry’s view, the intellect can abstract from a cognition of this being, formulating two distinct, simple concepts of being: a concept of being as undetermined but naturally determinable to some sort, which applies to all creatures, and a concept of being that is undetermined and indeterminable—it is by nature unlimited—which applies uniquely to God. There cannot, however, be a single, simple concept of being applicable to all things. That is because every concept has its foundation in some reality, but because he is transcendent, God has no reality in common with creatures. Nevertheless, because these two distinct concepts are both concepts of undetermined being, our intellect cannot easily distinguish them and so conflates them into one confused concept. While this is, strictly speaking, an error, it is a fruitful error, allowing us to reason from knowledge of creatures to quidditative knowledge of God, even though God is transcendent.

We can see in Henry’s account an attempt to secure the advantages of maintaining that the concept of being is univocal without giving up the traditional view that the concept is analogical. Scotus is sympathetic to Henry’s goal. After all, if Henry were successful, then Scotus’s worries about the unity of metaphysics and the possibility of natural theology would disappear. Nevertheless, Scotus finds Henry’s view problematic because, if we accept it, we can reasonably call into question the univocal unity of any concept. If the intellect naturally conflates very close concepts, then how can we be sure that there is a unique concept human being that applies to both Socrates and Plato? There could well be two distinct concepts that we naturally conflate because of their great resemblance.

c. Arguments for Univocity

In reply, Scotus offers a barrage of arguments for univocity and disarms the objection that his view would require the dismantling of Aristotelian ontology. The first of his arguments in the Ordinatio is perhaps his most influential for establishing the univocity of being. Suppose a person P is certain of one concept, but doubtful about others. Because a single concept cannot be both certain and dubious, the concept P is certain of must be different from the ones P is doubtful of. However, P can be certain that God is a being, but in doubt about whether God is a finite or infinite being, a created or uncreated being. Therefore, this concept of being that P is certain of is different from all the other concepts (finite, infinite, created, and uncreated being), but included in them and therefore univocal (Ord. 1 d.3 p.1 q.1-2 n.27). Our concepts of radically diverse beings, such as God and creatures, substances and accidents, still must contain as a component a univocal concept of being. However, this does not imply that these beings are simply species of a single common genus. Instead, finite and infinite are intrinsic modes of being (see Section 3 above), not differences dividing it, and so it does not follow that there is any nature common to God and creature. Nor is finite being in turn a genus and the categories its species. Each category is fundamentally diverse, with substance prior to all non-substance categories (Ord 1 d.3 p.1 q.3 n.164). Despite this diversity, our concept of each category includes a univocal concept of being as a component.

Scotus can use this same argument to show the univocity of other concepts besides being, such as goodness, wisdom, and power, which are likewise attributed to God. The universal practice of natural theology, that is, metaphysical inquiry about God, confirms the argument’s conclusion by showing that natural theologians are committed to univocity. First, they apply the Anselmian criterion to discover which notions are applicable to God, a criterion whose use, as we have seen, already presupposes univocity. Once they have formed a list (for example, goodness, wisdom, power, happiness), they remove the imperfection connected with these notions in the case of creatures. Finally, they ascribe to these notions the highest degree of perfection and attribute them to God. What is important, however, is that throughout this process the formal notions remain the same whether applied to creatures or to God.

Scotus’s arguments for univocity do not rule out the possibility of analogical predication. In addition to a univocal concept of wisdom applicable to both God and intellectual creatures, there is a concept of wisdom proper to intellectual creatures, which specifies wisdom as finite and qualitative, and a concept of wisdom proper to God, which specifies wisdom as formally infinite. The two concepts are constructed of a plurality of components, some of which diverge, but each contains this identical component: the simple, univocal concept of wisdom. The same will be true of all analogical concepts: They will diverge in some of their components, but at their root will lie a simple, univocal component that they share. We can see how the concepts diverge only after we have noted what they have in common. Hence, although analogy is possible, it is possible only because of univocity.

We might worry that Scotus’s teaching on univocity threatens the traditional religious doctrine of divine transcendence, a doctrine Scotus himself endorses. According to that doctrine, God is wholly different from creatures, having no reality in common with them. However, Scotus’s teaching on univocity seems to imply that God and creatures have absolute perfections in common, since such predicates as “good,” “wise,” and “being” are attributable to God and creatures in the same way and the same sense. Scotus replies to the objection about divine transcendence by reminding us that his remarks on univocity constitute not a metaphysical doctrine, but a logical one. The metaphysical divide between God and creatures is a radical one, for God and creatures have no reality in common. God’s absolute perfections, such as his being, wisdom, and goodness, which are infinite, are utterly diverse from ours, which are finite. However, by removing from our concepts of absolute perfections those features that make them proper to God or proper to creatures, such as the modes finite or infinite, we can form “incomplete” concepts of absolute perfections univocally applicable to both God and creatures. The formation of such concepts, therefore, does not impugn divine transcendence.

8. Cognition

a. Intuitive and Abstractive Cognition

Scotus distinguishes two sorts of cognition. Cognition of a thing insofar as it actually exists and is present is intuitive cognition, while cognition of a thing that abstracts from actual existence is abstractive cognition. Some sensory cognitions are abstractive, as when one daydreams about pears ripe for the picking. This cognition conveys no information about the way any actual pears are. Other sensory cognitions are intuitive, as when one sees, smells, or touches a pear ripe on the tree. This cognition does convey information about these actually existing pears. More interesting, however, is Scotus’s application of this distinction to intellectual acts. We clearly have intellectual abstractive cognition. When the sensory powers furnish it with phantasms, the intellect can understand the natures of things, and that sort of understanding in turn makes scientific knowledge possible. However, one can have abstractive cognitions, even scientific knowledge of, saber-toothed cats and dodo birds without the slightest idea that they do not actually exist.

Do human beings also have intellectual intuitive cognitions? Sometimes Scotus seems hesitant to admit that we do; after all, in this life, at any rate, human beings cognize things intellectually through phantasms. However, in many passages he argues that we regularly cognize things intuitively. After all, if we did not have an intuitive cognition of things as actually existing, how could we reason about the particular objects around us? Moreover, since my intellectual acts are not directly accessible to my senses, the only way I could know them without reasoning inductively from their effects is by intuitive cognition. Finally, appealing to the principle that whatever a lower power can do, a higher power can also do, Scotus concludes that, because sensory powers are capable of both intuitive and abstractive cognition, so is the intellect. Scholars disagree about whether Scotus’s apparently conflicting claims about intuitive cognition can be reconciled, with Day [1947] arguing for consistency, Wolter [1990a] contending that Scotus changes his views over time, and Pasnau [2003] opting for inconsistency. Despite the problems about what Scotus in fact thinks, the distinction between intuitive and abstractive cognition itself exercised an enormous influence, most notably on Ockham, but on nearly all subsequent scholastic discussions of cognition, especially those devoted to certainty and skepticism.

b. Divine Illumination and Skepticism

At the end of the thirteenth century, the theory of divine illumination still had its defenders, although fewer and fewer. The theory had been widely accepted, thanks to Augustine’s many and powerful arguments in its favor. Even early in his career, Augustine had argued that purely natural processes cannot result in knowledge. A teacher’s discourse can lead us to true beliefs, but knowledge requires something further: One must “see” that what the teacher says is true, a sort of justification available only through God’s special illumination of the mind. Augustine’s arguments exerted their influence for more than eight centuries, despite opposition from such formidable opponents as Aquinas, who contends at the very least that no special divine illumination is necessary for knowledge. The illumination theory’s last able defender is Henry of Ghent, whose influential writings kept the theory alive until Scotus wielded his pen against it.

Henry argues that our cognition of things would fall short of certainty without God’s special illumination, for two reasons. First, when we cognize things intellectually by purely natural processes, our cognition stems from an exemplar that is itself changeable. With a changeable basis, our cognition must likewise be changeable and so not certain. Second, the other basis of our cognition, the human soul, is likewise changeable and therefore fallible. We can attain certain knowledge, therefore, only if we have access to the unchangeable, uncreated exemplar, which only God can grant by a special illumination.

Scotus offers some brief but influential objections to Henry’s version of the theory. Henry maintains that what is in the soul as a subject is mutable, even its own act of intellection; but if that is the case, then an illuminated intellection is itself mutable. In that case, even divine illumination fails to preserve the soul from error. Moreover, Henry contends that created as well as uncreated exemplars play a role in producing certain knowledge. However, because the created exemplar is incompatible with certainty, adding an uncreated exemplar does not achieve certainty any more than adding necessary premises to contingent ones in an argument results in a necessary conclusion.

These negative arguments take aim at Henry’s version of the theory of illumination in particular, not against any and every version of the theory. However, Scotus did considerable damage to any future attempts to formulate a divine illumination theory by undercutting its motivation. On his view, we do not need a theory of illumination to show that certain knowledge is possible. The human intellect, by purely natural processes, can attain it, and in four sorts of cases:

1. We can have certain knowledge of principles because they are self-evident through their terms. As long as one grasps the meaning of the terms, one immediately sees that the principle is true. For instance, anyone who understands the term “whole” and “part” has a certain and immediate grasp of the principle that the whole is greater than the part.

2. Experience can also result in certain knowledge, such as our knowledge that magnets attract iron. This sort of knowledge is partly grounded in the first sort, because it depends on our certain knowledge of the principle “Whatever results for the most part from an unfree cause is that cause’s natural effect,” which is self-evident through its terms. On the basis of this principle and experience, we can gain certain knowledge through induction.

3. We can have certain knowledge of our acts and mental states, such as whether we are understanding or willing. We can even be certain that we are seeing, Scotus contends. If I see a flash of light, but there is no light in the room, the species causing my visual act must still exist in my eye, and so I am genuinely seeing something, although not something outside my own body. The level of certainty we gain from knowledge in this case is no less than that we gain from grasping principles evident through their terms.

4. We can also have certain sensory knowledge, thanks to the same self-evident principle that grounds the certainty of induction. If the same object, always or for the most part, causes multiple senses to judge that it has property F, then we can be certain that the object really has property F. Even if the senses conflict, as when vision tells us that the distant Goliath is smaller than the nearby David, but hearing tells us that Goliath’s stentorian voice comes from a giant, we can still attain certain knowledge by appealing to self-evident principles to correct the erroneous judgment.

9. Natural Law

Scholastic philosophical theologians are taxed not just with solving philosophical problems and creating philosophical systems, but with doing so in ways consistent with Biblical religion. Now, Genesis reports that the holy patriarch Abraham set out to kill his own son and that the holy patriarch Jacob took two wives, while Exodus tells of midwives who lied to Pharaoh and yet were rewarded by God. For a scholastic thinker, these texts would naturally raise questions about the status of the natural law, especially that portion of it recorded in the Ten Commandments, or Decalogue. If, as the scriptures suggest, these agents did not do wrong in acting as they did, did they not, despite appearances, violate the natural law? Or did God grant a dispensation from the law?

It is with these issues in mind that Scotus offers his most revealing discussion of the natural law. According to Scotus, God has in fact offered dispensations from the law. Dispensation may take two forms: God can revoke the law, or God can clarify the law. However, even God is limited in the extent to which he can dispense. That is because the natural law in the strict sense consists of laws known through themselves on the basis of their terms. Because they are logically necessary truths, they cannot be revoked, at the very least. Scotus takes the first two commandments of the Decalogue to belong to the law of nature in the strict sense. The commandment to love God, for example, exemplifies the principle that what is best is to be loved most, which is known through itself. Even God could not make it licit to hate him.

The natural law in the broad sense consists of laws that are “exceptionally harmonious” with the natural law in the strict sense. These laws are not known through themselves on the basis of their terms; their truth value is contingent. Therefore, God can grant dispensations from these laws, which include all the commandments in the second table of the Decalogue. Unfortunately, Scotus does not explain what he means when he says that the law of nature in the broad sense consists of laws that are “exceptionally harmonious” with the law of nature in the strict sense, and his vagueness has inspired astoundingly different interpretations of his account of natural law.

In some texts, Scotus presents a view of moral goodness that appears to be largely naturalistic. For example, in his 18th Quodlibet, Scotus writes that an agent’s act is morally good if it has an appropriate object, is performed in appropriate circumstances, is of a sort appropriate for the agent to perform, and furthermore if the agent rightly judges this to be the case and then acts on that judgment. To make these judgments about appropriateness, one needs to know only the nature of the agent, of the act, and of the power through which the agent performs the act. The moral law in its broad sense is therefore based on the natures of things and is accordingly rationally accessible to humans. On this interpretation, since human nature and human powers remain constant, the law of nature in the broad sense could change only if circumstances change, rendering appropriate what used to be inappropriate (or vice versa); in that case, however, God’s act of dispensation would seem little more than a formality.

In other texts, such as Ordinatio 1 d.44 n.6, Scotus appears to hold that what constitutes the natural law in the broad sense is simply God’s will: God wills certain propositions to be law, and they are thereby law. There is nothing self-contradictory about a system of law very different from the one we live under, for instance, a system that at least sometimes permits the killing or torture of the innocent, the telling of falsehoods, and stealing others’ property, and so no logical necessity of the sort we find in the first commandment constrains God from promulgating an alternative system of laws such as this. As Williams [1998] notes in reply to the objection that such a system is inconsistent with God’s own justice, Scotus contends that God can do whatever is not logically impossible, and whatever God wills is by that very fact right (Rep. 4 d46 q4). God’s justice, therefore, does not constrain his will to any single consistent system of laws; he may will any consistent system. It is simply God’s will that certain propositions comprise the moral law rather than others. If the laws we in fact live under benefit us, that is due to God’s graciousness, not his justice. On this interpretation, however, it is hard to see how human beings have rational access to the natural law. Williams [1997] suggests that the Biblical assertion that God writes his commandments on our hearts be interpreted to mean that God gives us moral intuitions that accord with his commands, but if that is the case, when God grants dispensations, those very intuitions (and the moral and cultural institutions built on them) would lead us far astray.

10. Action Theory and Will

Mediaeval philosophers agree that human acts have their source in the powers of will and intellect, and in articulating their detailed action theories and rich moral psychologies, these thinkers spell out the respective roles of the will and intellect. They often disagree, however, about what those roles are and, in particular, about the relative priority of these powers in the production of human acts, with intellectualists giving greater priority to the intellect and voluntarists to the will. Of course, that priority could take many forms, and so we find mediaeval philosophers investigating the extent to which the intellect influences, determines, causes, or necessitates the will’s act, and vice versa; whether our freedom or control over our acts stems more from the will, the intellect, or equally from both; and whether we resemble God more in our intellects or in our wills. While most mediaeval thinkers offer nuanced theories, the views of Aquinas, Giles of Rome, and Godfrey of Fontaines are predominately intellectualist, while those of Henry of Ghent and Peter John Olivi are predominately voluntarist. The debates between intellectualists and voluntarists are important not just because they represent disputes over the origination of human acts, but because they also represent deep disagreements on the nature of free will and rationality, on what makes humans morally responsible, and on the role of virtue in morality.

Scotus’s action theory is largely voluntarist. Although he admits that the intellect plays an important role in human action (after all, the will cannot will something that the intellect is not thinking of, nor can it will something that the intellect does not perceive as somehow good), in contrast to intellectualists such as Aquinas, Scotus denies that the intellect’s judgment about what one should pursue or avoid ever determines which alternative the will wills or, for that matter, whether it wills anything at all. Moreover, the will plays a large role in determining what the intellect thinks: Once the intellect has some object in mind, no matter how peripherally, the will can direct the intellect’s focus and regulate its thought accordingly.

Scotus means to show not just that the will is a higher power than the intellect, however. He argues for the remarkable claim that the will is unique among all created powers because it alone acts freely. Scotus’s account of the will’s freedom is complex, to say the least: In no other discussions does Scotus do more to earn his epithet “subtle.” Nevertheless, the following three key elements of his account should serve to summarize his audacious but sometimes murky discussion.

1. Some potentialities have natures that determine what operations they will or will not perform in any given set of circumstances. A 400 degree oven always operates the same way, and so unless there is some impediment, it will roast meat and dry clay, for that is the nature of heat. The way such human powers as the senses, sensory appetites, and even the intellect operate is also determined by their natures, even if they do have a greater intrinsic value than mere heat. The only power whose nature does not determine its operations is the will, which alone is a self-determining power for opposites. Among created things, the will alone transcends nature, not because it does not have a nature, but because no nature, including its own, determines its acts [Boler 1993]. The will, then, satisfies one necessary condition for freedom: It determines itself regarding opposites; that is, it determines whether it wills this object or that one, and also whether it wills this object or refrains from willing entirely.

2. The will’s capacity for self-determination is a necessary but not a sufficient condition for freedom because, as Scotus argues, even self-determined operations may be necessary. If the will’s acts are to be free, they must be contingent. To see what Scotus means, consider the following “diachronic” account of contingency. At time T1, the will has a real potentiality for willing a or b, as well as for refraining from willing. At time T2, the will determines itself to one of these alternatives, say, a. The proponent of this view admits that at T2 there is no longer a real potentiality for both opposites, but that does not matter because the real potentiality for opposites at T1 ensures the contingency of the will’s operation at T2. That strategy fails, Scotus argues, because contingency can be a feature only of something that is actual, and at T1 the will’s operation is not actual. Therefore, nothing at T1 can explain why the will’s operation at T2 is contingent. Rather, we must look for some feature of the will at T2 if we are to find an explanation of its contingency.

Scotus therefore argues that at T2 the will is really capable of opposites, even when it is determined to one of them. Like all the soul’s powers, the will is a first actuality, and so naturally prior to its operations, which are second actualities. To capture this idea of natural priority within a single instant of time, Scotus employs the device of instants of nature. In a single temporal instant T2 we find instants of nature N1 and N2. At N1 the will has a real potentiality for either a or b. At N2, the will determines itself to a. However, because all this occurs in a single instant of time T2, it is still true because of N1 that at T2 the will has a real potentiality for b, even though at that very temporal instant it is actually willing a. Therefore the will’s operation at T2 is contingent because of features true of the will at T2. Because the will’s operation is both contingent and self-determined, it is free. Finally, it is worth noting that this view does not imply the absurdity that the will can simultaneously will multiple opposites. For instance, a person cannot at the same time both intend to pursue a college degree and intend to stay out of school forever. Rather, if a person at T2 intends to pursue a college degree, there is at T2 the real potentiality for intending to stay out of school forever, but not for intending both.

3. Medieval eudaimonist philosophers contend that the will is determined to seek happiness, that is, the fulfillment of one’s nature. However, because one can at least partly determine the constituents of happiness, and because one can pursue happiness by different means, this determination of the will does not introduce any necessitation incompatible with free will and moral responsibility. Nor does eudaimonism amount to psychological egoism, because justice and its associated virtues are themselves constituents of or at the least, means to the fulfillment of one’s own nature. Eudaimonism, therefore, is no opponent of the moral life. Scotus, however, finds this line of thought problematic, and in spelling out his alternative to eudaimonism he articulates the third element in his discussion of freedom.

Drawing on Anselm’s discussion in On the Fall of the Devil, Scotus contends that in addition to the affection for the fulfillment of one’s nature, or affection for advantage, the will has a second affection, the affection for justice. Thanks to the affection for advantage, the will can seek things insofar as they benefit the willer. Thanks to the affection for justice, the will can seek things insofar as they are good in themselves. As Boler [1993] points out, the presence of the affection for justice over and above that for advantage explains two closely related human characteristics: the will’s capacity to transcend what is natural and the sort of freedom necessary for moral responsibility.

The precise sort of freedom Scotus thinks the affection for justice affords us, however, remains unclear. He might mean that our having the affection for justice in addition to the affection for advantage gives us moral freedom, that is, the freedom to determine whether and to what extent we will act justly. On the other hand, he might mean that having the affection for justice gives us metaphysical freedom, the freedom of self-determination. There is some reason to think that Scotus means both. In a famous example, Scotus asks us to conceive of a creature with an intellectual appetite that has merely one affection, the affection for advantage (because it lacks the affection for justice, this appetite does not count as a genuine will). Such a being, Scotus contends, would always seek its advantage and seek it to the maximum possible, for there would be no countervailing affection to place any restraints on its pursuit of advantage. It would therefore lack both moral freedom and metaphysical freedom as well. However, Scotus offers few details, and it is hard to see why such a creature could not have metaphysical freedom, even if it lacks moral freedom. If the will’s self-determination were limited to balancing the willer’s own advantage against the concerns of justice, then it would be easier to see Scotus’s motives for associating the affection for justice with metaphysical freedom. However, Scotus holds that it is possible, without any intellectual error or misleading passion, to will something unjust that is still less advantageous than an alternative open to the willer. In this case, the affection for justice plays no apparent role in explaining the will’s self-determination, and so it has struck some scholars that the addition of this affection explains the will’s moral freedom but not its metaphysical freedom. On the other hand, Scotus insists that the will’s two affections are not independent wills. Rather, the “addition” of the affection for justice transforms the intellectual appetite so that when one wills, the will always acts with both affections. One cannot “use” just one affection and not the other, even if one is pursuing simply one’s own advantage or simply justice. However, these observations still do not explain how the addition of the affection for justice affords the will metaphysical freedom (if in fact it does), and Scotus says little to shed any more light on the subject.

11. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Texts in Latin

  • Cuestiones Cuodlibetales (1963). In ed. Felix Alluntis, Obras del Doctor Sutil, Juan Duns Escoto. Madrid: Biblioteca de Autores Cristianos.
  • Opera Omnia (1639), ed. Luke Wadding. Lyons, 12 vols., revised and enlarged by L. Vives (1891-1895). Paris, 26 vols.
  • Opera Omnia (1950-). Ed. Scotistic Commission. Vatican City: Typis Polyglottis Vaticanis, 11 vols. prepared to date.

b. Primary Texts in English Translation

  • Duns Scotus, Metaphysician (1995). Ed. and trans. William A. Frank and Allan B. Wolter. West Lafayette: Purdue University Press.
  • Duns Scotus on the Will and Morality (1986). Ed. and trans. Allan Wolter. Washington: Catholic University of America Press.
  • John Duns Scotus: The Examined Report of the Paris Lecture (Reportatio I-A), vol. 1 (2004). Ed. and trans. Allan B. Wolter and Oleg V. Bychkov. St. Bonaventure: The Franciscan Institute.
  • John Duns Scotus: God and Creatures (1981). The Quodlibetal Questions. Trans. Allan Wolter and Felix Alluntis. Washington: Catholic University of America Press.
  • John Duns Scotus: A Treatise on God as First Principle (1983). Ed. Allan Wolter. Chicago: Franciscan Herald Press.
  • Philosophical Writings (1987). Trans. and ed. Allan Wolter. Indianapolis: Hackett.

c. Secondary Literature

  • Adams, Marilyn McCord (1976). “Ockham on Identity and Distinction,” in Franciscan Studies 36: 5-74.
  • Boler, John (1993). “Transcending the Natural: Duns Scotus on the Two Affections of the Will,” in American Catholic Philosophical Quarterly 67: 109-22.
  • Boulnois, Olivier (1989). “Analogie et univocité selon Duns Scot: La double destruction,” in Les etudes philosophiques 3/4: 347-83.
  • Cross, Richard (1999). Duns Scotus. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Cross, Richard (2002). “Duns Scotus on Divine Substance and the Trinity,” in Medieval Philosophy and Theology 11:181-201.
  • Day, Sebastian (1947). Intuitive Cognition: A Key to the Significance of the Later Scholastics. St. Bonaventure: The Franciscan Institute.
  • Dumont, Stephen (1987). “The Univocal Concept of Being in the Fourteenth Century: I. John Duns Scotus and William of Alnwick,” in Medieval Studies 49: 1-75.
  • Gelber, Hester Goodenough (1974). Logic and the Trinity: A Clash of Values in Scholastic Thought, 1300-1335. Ph.D. dissertation, University of Wisconson.
  • Gracia, Jorge J.E (1984). Introduction to the Problem of Individuation in the Early Middle Ages. Washington: The Catholic University of America Press.
  • King, Peter (2003). “Scotus on Metaphysics,” Chapter 1 in Williams [2003], 15-68.
  • Pasnau, Robert (2003). “Cognition,” Chapter 9 in Williams [2003], 285-311.
  • Williams, Thomas (1997). “Reason, Morality, and Voluntarism in Duns Scotus: A Pseudo-Problem Dissolved,” in The Modern Schoolman 74: 73-94.
  • Williams, Thomas (1998). “The Unmitigated Scotus,” in Archiv für Geschichte der Philosophie 80: 162-81.
  • Williams, Thomas, ed. (2003). The Cambridge Companion to Duns Scotus. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Wolter, Allan (1990a). “Duns Scotus on Intuition, Memory, and Our Knowledge of Individuals,” Chapter 5 in Wolter [1990b], 98-122.
  • Wolter, Allan (1990b). The Philosophical Theology of John Duns Scotus, ed. Marilyn McCord Adams. Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
  • Wolter, Allan (2003). “The Unshredded Scotus: A Reply to Thomas Williams,” in American Catholic Philosophical Quarterly 77: 315-356.

Author Information

Jeffrey Hause
Creighton University
U. S. A.

William of Ockham (Occam, c. 1280—c. 1349)

William of OckhamWilliam of Ockham, also known as William Ockham and William of Occam, was a fourteenth-century English philosopher. Historically, Ockham has been cast as the outstanding opponent of Thomas Aquinas (1224-1274): Aquinas perfected the great “medieval synthesis” of faith and reason and was canonized by the Catholic Church; Ockham destroyed the synthesis and was condemned by the Catholic Church. Although it is true that Aquinas and Ockham disagreed on most issues, Aquinas had many other critics, and Ockham did not criticize Aquinas any more than he did others. It is fair enough, however, to say that Ockham was a major force of change at the end of the Middle Ages. He was a courageous man with an uncommonly sharp mind. His philosophy was radical in his day and continues to provide insight into current philosophical debates.

The principle of simplicity is the central theme of Ockham’s approach, so much so that this principle has come to be known as “Ockham’s Razor.” Ockham uses the razor to eliminate unnecessary hypotheses. In metaphysics, Ockham champions nominalism, the view that universal essences, such as humanity or whiteness, are nothing more than concepts in the mind. He develops an Aristotelian ontology, admitting only individual substances and qualities. In epistemology, Ockham defends direct realist empiricism, according to which human beings perceive objects through “intuitive cognition,” without the help of any innate ideas. These perceptions give rise to all of our abstract concepts and provide knowledge of the world. In logic, Ockham presents a version of supposition theory to support his commitment to mental language. Supposition theory had various purposes in medieval logic, one of which was to explain how words bear meaning. Theologically, Ockham is a fideist, maintaining that belief in God is a matter of faith rather than knowledge. Against the mainstream, he insists that theology is not a science and rejects all the alleged proofs of the existence of God. Ockham’s ethics is a divine command theory. In the Euthyphro dialogue, Plato (437-347 B.C.E.) poses the following question: Is something good because God wills it or does God will something because it is good? Although most philosophers affirm the latter, divine command theorists affirm the former. Ockham’s divine command theory can be seen as a consequence of his metaphysical libertarianism. In political theory, Ockham advances the notion of rights, separation of church and state, and freedom of speech.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Works
  2. The Razor
  3. Metaphysics: Nominalism
  4. Epistemology
    1. Direct Realist Empiricism
    2. Intuitive Cognition
  5. Logic
    1. Mentalese
    2. Supposition Theory
    3. The Categories
  6. Theology
    1. Fideism
      1. Theology is Not a Science
      2. The Trinity is a Logical Contradiction
      3. There Is No Evidence of Purpose in the Natural World
    2. Against the Proofs of God’s Existence
      1. The Ontological Proof
      2. The Cosmological Proof
  7. Ethics
    1. Divine Command Theory
    2. Metaphysical Libertarianism
  8. Political Theory
    1. Rights
    2. Separation of Church and State
    3. Freedom of Speech
  9. References and Further Reading
    1. Ockham’s Works in Latin
    2. Ockham’s Works in English Translation
    3. Books about Ockham

1. Life and Works

Very little biographical information about Ockham survives. There is a record of his ordination in the year 1306. From this, we infer that he was born between 1280 and 1285, presumably in the small town of Ockham, twenty-five miles southwest of London, England. The medieval church in this town, All Saints, recently installed a stained glass window of Ockham because it is probably the church in which he grew up. Nevertheless, we know nothing of Ockham’s childhood or family. Most likely, he spoke Middle English and wrote exclusively in Latin.

Because Ockham joined the Franciscan order (known as the Order of the Friars Minor or OFM), he would have received his early education at a Franciscan house. From there, he pursued a degree in theology at Oxford University. He never completed it, however, because in 1323 he was summoned to the papal court, which had been moved from Rome to Avignon, to answer to charges of heresy.

Ockham remained in Avignon under a loose form of house arrest for four years while the papacy carried out its investigation. Through this ordeal Ockham became convinced that the papacy was corrupt and finally decided to flee with some other Franciscans on trial there. On May 26, 1328 they escaped in the night on stolen horses to the court of Louis of Bavaria, a would-be emperor, who had his own reasons for opposing the Pope. They were all ex-communicated and hunted down but never captured.

After a brief and unsuccessful campaign in Italy, Louis and his entourage settled in Munich. Ockham spent the rest of his days there as a political activist, writing treatises against the papacy. Ockham died sometime between 1347 and 1349, unreconciled with the Catholic Church. Because he never returned to his academic career, Ockham acquired the nickname “Venerable Inceptor”—an “inceptor” being one who is on the point of earning a degree. Ockham’s other nickname is the “More than Subtle Doctor” because he was thought to have surpassed the Franciscan philosopher John Duns Scotus (1265/6-1308), who was known as the Subtle Doctor.

Methodologically, Ockham fits comfortably within the analytic philosophical tradition. He considers himself a devoted follower of Aristotle (384-322 B.C.E.), whom he calls “The Philosopher,” though most Aristotle scholars would find many of his interpretations dubious. Ockham may simply have a unique understanding of Aristotle or he may be using Aristotle as cover for developing views he knew would be threatening to the status quo.

Aside from Aristotle, the French Franciscan philosopher Peter John Olivi (1248 - 1298) was the single most important influence on Ockham. Olivi is an extremely original thinker, pioneering direct realism, nominalism, metaphysical libertarianism, and many of the same political views that Ockham defends later in his career. One notable difference between the two, however, is that, while Ockham loves Aristotle, Olivi hates him. Ockham never acknowledges Olivi because Olivi was condemned as a heretic.

Ockham published several philosophical works before losing official status as an academic. The first was his Commentary on the Sentences of Peter Lombard, a standard requirement for medieval theology students. The philosopher and archbishop Peter Lombard (1100–1160/4) composed a book of opinions (sententia) for and against various controversial claims. By commenting on this book, students would learn the art of argumentation while at the same time developing their own views. As a student, Ockham also wrote several commentaries on the works of Aristotle. In addition, he engaged in public debates, the proceedings of which were published under the titles Disputed Questions and Quodlibetal Questions—“quodlibet” meaning “whatever you like.” Ockham’s opus magnum, however, is his Suma Logicae, in which he lays out the fundamentals of his logic and its accompanying metaphysics. We do not know exactly when it was written, but it is the latest of his academic works. After the Avignon affair, Ockham wrote and circulated several political treatises unofficially, the most important of which is his Dialogue on the Power of the Emperor and the Pope. All of Ockham’s works have been edited into modern editions but not all have been translated.

2. The Razor

Ockham’s Razor is the principle of parsimony or simplicity according to which the simpler theory is more likely to be true. Ockham did not invent this principle; it is found in Aristotle, Aquinas, and other philosophers Ockham read. Nor did he call the principle a “razor.” In fact, the first known use of the term “Occam’s razor” occurs in 1852 in the work of the British mathematician William Rowan Hamilton. Although Ockham never even makes an argument for the validity of the principle, he uses it in many striking ways, and this is how it became associated with him.

For some, the principle of simplicity implies that the world is maximally simple. Aquinas, for example, argues that nature does not employ two instruments where one suffices. This interpretation of the principle is also suggested by its most popular formulation: “Entities should not be multiplied beyond necessity.” Yet this is a problematic assertion. We know today that nature is often redundant in both form and function. Although medieval philosophers were largely ignorant of evolutionary biology, they did affirm the existence of an omnipotent God, which is alone enough to render the assumption that the world is maximally simple suspicious. In any case, Ockham never makes this assumption and he does not use the popular formulation of the principle.

For Ockham, the principle of simplicity limits the multiplication of hypotheses not necessarily entities. Favoring the formulation “It is useless to do with more what can be done with less,” Ockham implies that theories are meant to do things, namely, explain and predict, and these things can be accomplished more effectively with fewer assumptions.

At one level, this is just common sense. Suppose your car suddenly stops running and your fuel gauge indicates an empty gas tank. It would be silly to hypothesize both that you are out of gas and that you are out of oil. You need only one hypothesis to explain what has happened.

Some would object that the principle of simplicity cannot guarantee truth. The gas gauge on your car may be broken or the empty gas tank may be just one of several things wrong with the car. In response to this objection, one might point out that the principle of simplicity does not tell us which theory is true but only which theory is more likely to be true. Moreover, if there is some other sign of damage, such as a blinking oil gage, then there is a further fact to explain, warranting an additional hypothesis.

Although the razor seems like common sense in everyday situations, when used in science, it can have surprising and powerful effects. For example, in his classic exposition of theoretical physics, A Brief History of Time, Stephen Hawking attributes the discovery of quantum mechanics to Ockham’s Razor.

Nevertheless, not everyone approves of the razor. Ockham’s contemporary and fellow Franciscan Walter Chatton proposed an “anti-razor” in opposition to Ockham. He declares that if three things are not enough to verify an affirmative proposition about things, a fourth must be added, and so on. Others call Ockham’s razor a “principle of stinginess,” accusing it of quashing creativity and imagination. Still others complain that there is no objective way to determine which of two theories is simpler. Often a theory that is simpler in one way is more complicated in another way. All of these concerns and others make Ockham’s razor controversial.

At bottom, Ockham advocates simplicity in order to reduce the risk of error. Every hypothesis carries the possibility that it may be wrong. The more hypotheses you accept, the more you increase your risk. Ockham strove to avoid error at all times, even if it meant abandoning well-loved, traditional beliefs. This approach helped to earn him his reputation as destroyer of the medieval synthesis of faith and reason.

3. Metaphysics: Nominalism

One of the most basic challenges in metaphysics is to explain how it is that things are the same despite differences. The Greek philosopher Heraclitus (540 - 480 B.C.E.) points out that you can never step into the same river twice, referring not just to rivers, but to places, people, and life itself. Every day everything changes a little bit and everywhere you go you find new things. Heraclitus concludes from such observations that nothing ever remains the same. All reality is in flux.

The problem with seeing the world this way is that it leads to radical skepticism: if nothing stays the same from moment to moment and from place to place, then we can never really be certain about anything. We can’t know our friends, we can’t know the world we live in, we can’t even know ourselves! Moreover, if Heraclitus is right, it seems science is impossible. We could learn the properties of a chemical here today and still have no basis for knowing its properties someplace else tomorrow.

Needless to say, most people would prefer to avoid skepticism. It’s hard to carry on in a state of complete ignorance. Besides, it seems obvious that science is not impossible. Studying the world really does enable us to know how things are over time and across distances. The fact that things change through time and vary from place to place does not seem to prevent us from having knowledge. From this, some philosophers, such as Plato and Augustine (354-430), draw the conclusion that Heraclitus was wrong to suppose that everything is in flux. Something stays the same, something that lays underneath the changing and varying surfaces we perceive, namely, the universal essence of things.

For example, although individual human beings change from day to day and vary from place to place, they all share the universal essence of humanity, which is eternally the same. Likewise for dogs, trees, rocks, and even qualities—there must be a universal essence of blueness, heat, love, and anything else one can think of. Universal essences are not physical realities; if you dissect a human being, you will not find humanity inside like a kidney or a lung! Nevertheless, universal essences are metaphysical realities: they provide the invisible structure of things.

Belief in universal essences is called “metaphysical realism,” because it asserts that universal essences are real even though we cannot physically see them. Although there are various different versions of metaphysical realism, they are all designed to secure a foundation for knowledge. It seems you have a choice: either you accept metaphysical realism or you are stuck with skepticism.

Ockham, however, argues that this is a false dilemma. He rejects metaphysical realism and skepticism in favor of nominalism: the view that universal essences are concepts in the mind. The word “nominalism” comes from the Latin word nomina, meaning name. Earlier nominalists such as the French philosopher Roscelin (1050-1125), had advanced the more radical view that universal essences are just names that have no basis in reality. Ockham developed a more sophisticated version of nominalism often called “conceptualism” because it holds that universal essences are concepts caused in our minds when we perceive real similarities among things in the world.

For example, when a child comes in contact with different human beings over time, he begins to form the concept of humanity. The realist would say that he has detected the invisible common structure of these individuals. Ockham, in contrast, insists that the child has merely perceived similarities that fit naturally under one concept.

It is tempting to assume that Ockham rejects metaphysical realism because of the principle of simplicity. After all, realism requires believing in invisible entities that might not actually exist. As a matter of fact, however, Ockham never uses the razor to attack realism. And on closer examination, this makes sense: the realist position is that the existence of universal essences is a hypothesis necessary to explain how science is possible. Since Ockham was just as concerned as everyone else to avoid skepticism, he might have been persuaded by such an argument.

Ockham has a much deeper worry about realism: he is convinced it is incoherent. Incoherence is the most serious charge a philosopher can level against a theory because it means that the theory contains a contradiction—and contradictions cannot be true. Ockham asserts that metaphysical realism cannot be true because it holds that a universal essence is one thing and many things at the same time. The form of humanity is one thing, because it is what all humans have in common, but it is also many things because it provides an invisible structure of each individual one of us. This is to say that it is both one thing and not one thing at the same time, which is a contradiction.

Realists claim that this apparent contradiction can be explained in various ways. Ockham insists, however, that no matter how you explain it, there is no way to avoid the fact that the notion of a universal essence is an impossible hypothesis. He writes,

There is no universal outside the mind really existing in individual substances or in the essences of things.... The reason is that everything that is not many things is necessarily one thing in number and consequently a singular thing. [Opera Philosophica II, pp. 11-12]

Ockham presents a thought experiment to prove universal essences do not exist. He writes that, according to realism, would follow that God would not be able to annihilate one individual substance without destroying the other individuals of the same kind. For, if he were to annihilate one individual, he would destroy the whole that is essentially that individual and, consequently, he would destroy the universal that is in it and in others of the same essence. Other things of the same essence would not remain, for they could not continue to exist without the universal that constitutes a part of them. [Opera Philosophica I, p. 51]

Since God is omnipotent, he should be able to annihilate a human being. But the universal form of humanity lies within that human being. So, by destroying the individual, he will destroy the universal. And if he destroys the universal, which is humanity, then he destroys all the other humans as well.

The realist may wish to reply that destroying an individual human destroys only part of the universal humanity. But this contradicts the original assertion that the universal humanity is a single shared essence that is eternally the same for everyone! For Ockham, this problem decisively defeats realism and leaves us with the nominalist alternative that universals are concepts caused in our minds when we perceive similar individuals. To support this alternative, Ockham develops an empiricist epistemology.

4. Epistemology

a. Direct Realist Empiricism

Epistemology is the study of knowledge: what is it, and how do we come to have it? There are two basic approaches to epistemology: rationalists claim that knowledge consists of innate certainties that we discover through reason; empiricists claim that knowledge consists in accurate perceptions that we accumulate through experience. Although early medieval philosophers such as Augustine and Anselm (1033-1109) were innatists, empiricism came to dominate during the high Middle Ages. This is mostly because Aristotle was an empiricist and the texts in which he promotes empiricism were rediscovered and translated for the first time into Latin during the thirteenth century.

Following Aristotle, Ockham asserts that human beings are born blank states: there are no innate certainties to be discovered in our minds. We learn by observing qualities in objects. Ockham’s version of empiricism is called “direct realism” because he denies that there is any intermediary between the perceiver and the world. (Note that direct realism should not be confused with metaphysical realism, which Ockham rejects, as discussed above.) Direct realism states that if you see an apple, its redness causes you to know that it is red. This may seem obvious, but it actually raises a problem that has led many empiricists, both in Ockham’s day and today, to reject direct realism.

As the French philosopher Peter Aureol (1275-1333) points out, the problem is that there are cases where we perceive something that is not really there. In optical illusions, hallucinations, and dreams, our perceptions are completely disconnected with the external world.

Representationalism is the version of empiricism designed to solve this problem. According to representationalists, human beings perceive the world through a mental mediary, or representation, known in the Middle Ages as the “intelligible species.” Normally, an apple causes an intelligible species of itself for us to perceive it through. In cases of optical illusions, hallucinations, and dreams, something else causes the intelligible species. The perception seems veridical to us because there is no difference in the intelligible species. Even before Peter Aureol, Thomas Aquinas advocated representationalism, and it soon became the dominant view.

The difficulty with representationalism, as the Irish philosopher George Berkeley (1685-1754) amply demonstrates, is that once you introduce an intermediary between the perceiver and the external world, you lose your justification for belief in the external world. If all of our ideas come through representations, how do we know what, if anything, is behind these representations? Something other than physical objects could be causing them. For example, God could be transmitting representations of physical objects to our minds without ever creating any physical objects at all—which is in fact what Berkeley came to believe. This view, known as idealism, is radically skeptical, and most philosophers prefer to avoid it.

b. Intuitive Cognition

Ockham preempts idealism through the notion of intuitive cognition, which plays a crucial role in his four-step account of knowledge acquisition. It can be summarized as follows. The first step is sensory cognition: receiving data through the five senses. This is an ability human beings share with animals. The second step, intuitive cognition, is uniquely human. Intuitive cognition is an awareness that the particular individual perceived exists and has the qualities it has. The third step is recordative cognition, by which we remember past perceptions. The fourth step is abstractive cognition, by which we place individuals in groups of similar individuals.

Notice that, if an apple is set in front of a horse, the horse will receive data about the apple—the color, the smell, etc.—and react appropriately. The horse will not, however, register the reality of the object. Suppose you project a realistic, laser image of an apple in front of the horse and he tries to take a bite. He will become frustrated, and eventually give up, but he will never really “get it.” Human beings, in contrast, have reality-sensitive minds. It’s not a matter of thinking “This is real” every time we see something. On the contrary, Ockham asserts that intuitive cognition is non-propositional. Rather, it is a matter of registering that the apple really has the qualities we perceive. Ockham writes:

Intuitive cognition is such that when some things are cognized, of which one inheres in the other, or one is spatially distant from the other, or exists in some relation to the other, immediately in virtue of that non-propositional cognition of those things, it is known if the thing inheres or does not inhere, if it is spatially distant or not, and the same for other true contingent propositions, unless that cognition is flawed or there is some impediment. [Opera Theologica I, p. 31]

While intuitive cognition is itself non-propositional, it provides the basis for formulating true propositions. A horse cannot say “This apple is red” because its mind is not complex enough to register the reality of what it perceives. The human mind, registering the existence of things—both that they are and how they are—can therefore formulate assertions about them.

Strictly speaking, when one has an intuitive cognition of an apple, one is not yet thinking of it as an apple, because this requires placing it in a group. In normal adult human perception, all four of the above steps happen together so quickly that it is hard to separate them. But try to imagine what perception is like for a toddler: she sees the round, red object and points to it saying “That!” This is an expression of intuitive cognition.

Intuitive cognition secures a causal link between the external world and the human mind. The human mind is entirely passive, according to Ockham, during intuitive cognition. Objects in the world cause us to be aware of their existence, and this explains and justifies our belief in them.

Despite his insistence on the causal link between the world and our minds, Ockham clearly recognizes cases in which intuitive cognition causes false judgment. (See the last line of the above quotation: “...unless that cognition is flawed or there is some impediment.”) For example, when you see a stick half-emerged in water, it looks bent. This is because your intuitive cognition of the stick is being affected by your simultaneous intuitive cognition of the water, and this causes a skewed perception. In addition to leaving room for error on his account, Ockham also leaves room for skepticism: God can transmit representations to human beings that seem exactly like intuitive cognitions.

Given that direct realism cannot rule out skepticism any more than representationalism can, one might wonder why Ockham prefers it. In the end, it is a question of simplicity. Whereas Ockham never uses his razor against metaphysical realism, he does use it against representationalism. Intuitive cognition is necessary to secure a causal link between the world and the mind, and, once it is in place, there is no need for a middle man. The intelligible species is an unnecessary hypothesis.

It is worth noting that intuitive cognition also provides epistemological support for Ockham’s nominalist metaphysics. Representationalists typically hold that the intelligible species emanates from the universal essence of the thing. In their view, you perceive an apple as an apple because the apple’s universal essence of appleness is conveyed to you through its intelligible species. In fact, many metaphysical realists would argue for the superiority of their view precisely on the grounds that universal essences provide a basis for intelligible species, and intelligible species are necessary for us to know what we are perceiving. They would ask: how else do we ever identify apples as apples instead of just so many distinct individuals?

As we have seen, Ockham argues that there is no universal essence. There is therefore no basis for an intelligible species. Each object in the world is an absolute individual and that is how we perceive it at first. Just like toddlers, we are bombarded with a buzzing, booming confusion of colors and sounds. But our minds are powerful sorting machines. We remember perceptions over time (recordative cognition) and organize them into groups (abstractive cognition). This organizational process gives us a coherent understanding of the world and is what Ockham aims to explain in his account of logic.

5. Logic

a. Mentalese

Although the human mind is born without any knowledge, according to Ockham, it does come fully equip with a system for processing perceptions as they are acquired. This system is thought, which Ockham understands in terms of an unspoken, mental language. He is therefore considered an advocate of “mentalese,” like the American philosopher Noam Chomsky.

Ockham might compare thought to a machine ready to manipulate a vast quantity of empty boxes. As we observe the world, perceptions are placed in the empty boxes. Then the machine sorts and organizes the boxes according to content. Two small boxes with similar contents might be placed together in a big box, and then the big box might be conjoined to another big box. For example, as perceptions of Rover and Fido accumulate, they become the concept dog, and then the concept dog is associated with the concept fleas. This conceptual apparatus enables us to construct meaningful sentences, such as “All dogs have fleas.”

The intuitive cognition in Ockham’s epistemology provides a basis for what is today called a “causal theory of reference” in philosophy of language. The word “dog” means dog because the concept you think of when you write it or say it was caused by the dogs you have perceived. Dogs cause the same kinds of concepts in all human beings. Thus, mentalese is universal among us, even though there are different ways to speak and write words in different countries around the world. While written and spoken language is conventional, signification itself is natural.

Early in his career, Ockham entertained the notion that concepts are mental objects or “ficta” which resemble objects in the world like pictures. He abandoned ficta theory, however, because it presupposes a representationalist epistemology, which in turn presupposes metaphysical realism. Arguing instead for “intellectum theory,” according to which objects can have causal impact on the mind without creating mental pictures of themselves; he offers the following analogy. Medieval pubs received wine in shipments of wooden barrels sealed with hoops. When the shipment arrived, the pub owner would hang a barrel hoop outside the front door to communicate to the townspeople that wine was available. Although the hoop did not resemble wine in any way, it was significant to the townspeople. This is because the presence of the hoop was caused by the arrival of the wine. Likewise, dogs in the world cause concepts in our minds that are significant even though they do not resemble dogs.

It must be noted that there is a drawback to both the barrel hoop analogy and the box illustration: they portray concepts as things. For convenience, Ockham often speaks of concepts loosely as though they were things. However, according to intellectum theory, concepts are not really things at all but rather actions. Perceiving a dog does not cause an entity to exist in your mind; rather, it causes a mental act. Today we would say that it causes a neuron to fire. Repeated acts cause a habit: the disposition to perform the act at will. So, repeated perceptions of dogs cause repeated acts of dog-conceiving and those repeated acts cause a dog-conceiving habit, meaning that you can engage in dog-conceiving actions whenever you want, even when there are no dogs around to perceive.

b. Supposition Theory

In Ockham’s view, any coherent thought we have requires connecting or disconnecting concepts by means of linguistic operators. Ockham has a lot of ideas about how the linguistic operators work, which he develops in his version of supposition theory. Although supposition theory was a major preoccupation of late medieval logicians, scholars are still divided over its purpose. Some think it was an effort to build a system of formal logic that ultimately failed. Others think it was more akin to a modern theory of logical form.

Ockham’s interest in supposition theory seems motivated by his concern to clarify conceptual confusion. Much like Ludwig Wittgenstein (1889-1951), Ockham asserts that many philosophical errors arise due to the misunderstanding of language. He took metaphysical realism to be a prime example. Conceiving of human beings in general leads us to use the word “humanity.” Metaphysical realists conclude that this word must refer to a universal essence within all human beings. For Ockham, however, the word “humanity” stands for a habit that enables us to conceive of all the human beings we have perceived to date in a very efficient manner: stripped of all of their individual details. In this way, Ockham’s supposition theory is designed to support his nominalist metaphysics while elucidating the rules of thought.

The word “supposition” comes from the Latin word “stand for” but it closely approximates the technical notion known as “reference” in English. At its most basic level, supposition theory tells us how words used in sentences, which Ockham calls “terms,” refer to things.

Medieval logicians recognize three types of supposition—material, personal and simple—but their metaphysical commitments affect their analyses. Most everyone agrees about material supposition. It occurs when a term is mentioned rather than used, as is the term “stop” in the sentence, “The sign says ‘stop.’” But they disagree over personal and simple supposition. For Ockham, personal supposition occurs when a term stands for an object in the world, as does the term “cat” in the sentence, “The cat is on the mat” and simple supposition occurs when a term stands for a concept in the mind, as does “horse” in the sentence, “Horse is a species.” For Ockham’s realist opponents, in contrast, the term “species” stands for a universal essence, which is an object in the world. They therefore have a different account of personal and simple supposition.

In addition to three types of supposition, medieval logicians recognize two types of terms: categorematic and syncategorematic. Categorematic terms refer to existing things and are called “categorematic” because, in his Organon, Aristotle asserts that there are ten categories of existing things. Syncategorematic terms do not refer to anything at all. They are logical operators, such as “all,” “not,” “if,” and “only,” which tell how to associate or disassociate the categorematic terms in a sentence.

Among categorematic terms, some are absolute names while others are connotative names. Ockham describes the difference as follows:

Properly speaking, only absolute names, that is, concepts signifying things composed of matter and form, have definitions expressing real essence. Some examples of this sort of name are “human being,” “lion,” and “goat.” Connotative and relative names, on the other hand, which signify one thing directly and another thing indirectly, have definitions expressing nominal essence. Some examples of this sort of name are “white,” “hot,” “parent,” and “child.” [Opera Philosophica IX, p. 554]

The terms “human being” and “parent” are both names for Betty. The term “human being” signifies Betty in an absolute way because it refers to her alone as an independently existing object. The term “parent” signifies Betty in a connotative way because it signifies her while at the same time signifying her children.

c. The Categories

Although the distinction between absolute and connotative terms seems minor, Ockham uses it for radical purposes. According to the standard reading of the Organon, Aristotle holds that there are ten categories of existing things as follows: substance, quality, quantity, relation, place, time, position, state, action, and passion. According to Ockham’s reading, however, Aristotle holds that there are only two categories of existing things: substance and quality. Ockham bases his interpretation on the thesis that only substances and qualities have real essence definitions signifying things composed of matter and form. The other eight categories signify a substance or a quality while connoting something else. They therefore have nominal essence definitions, meaning that they are not existing things.

Consider quantity. Suppose you have one orange. It is a substance with a real essence of citrus fruit. Furthermore, it possesses several qualities, such as its color, its flavor, and its smell. The orange and its qualities are existing things according to Ockham. But the orange is also singular. Is its singularity an existing thing? For mathematical Platonists, the answer is yes: the number one exists as a universal essence and inheres in the orange. Ockham, in contrast, asserts that the singularity of the orange is just a short hand way of saying that there are no other oranges nearby. So, in the sentence “Here is one orange” the term “one” is connotative: it directly signifies the orange itself while indirectly signifying all the other oranges that are not here. Ockham eliminates the rest of the categories along the same lines.

Interestingly, Ockham’s elimination of quantity precipitated his summons to Avignon because it pushed him to a new account of the sacrament of the altar. The sacrament of the altar is the miracle that is supposed to occur when bread and wine are transformed into the body and blood of Jesus Christ. This process is known in theology as “transubstantiation” because one substance changes into another substance. The problem is to explain why the bread and wine continue to look, smell, and taste exactly the same despite the underlying change. According to the standard account, the qualities of the bread and wine continue to inhere in their quantity, which remains the same while substances are exchanged. According to Ockham, however, quantity is nothing other than the substance itself; if the substance changes then the quantity changes. So, the qualities cannot continue to inhere in the same quantity. Nor can they transfer from the substance of the bread and wine into the substance of Jesus because it would be blasphemous to say that Jesus was crunchy or wet! Ockham’s solution is to claim that the qualities of the bread and wine continue to exist all by themselves, accompanying the invisible substance of Jesus down the gullet. Needless to say, this solution was a bit too clever.

One question scholars continue to ask is why Ockham allows for two of the ten categories to remain instead of just one, namely, substance. It seems that qualities, such as whiteness, crunchiness, sweetness, etc, can just as easily be reduced to nominal essences: they signify the substance itself while connoting the tongue or nose or eye that perceives it. Of course, if Ockham had eliminated quality, he really would have had no basis left for saving the miracle of transubstantiation. Perhaps that was reason enough to stay his razor.

6. Theology

a. Fideism

Despite his departures from orthodoxy and his conflict with the papacy, Ockham never renounced Catholicism. He steadfastly embraced fideism, the view that belief in God is a matter of faith alone. Although fideism was soon to become common among Protestant thinkers, it was not so common among medieval Catholics. At the beginning of the Middle Ages, Augustine proposed a proof of the existence of God and promoted the view that reason is faith seeking understanding. While the standard approach for any medieval philosopher would be to recognize a role for both faith and reason in religion, Ockham makes an uncompromising case for faith alone.

Three assertions reveal Ockham to be a fideist.

i. Theology is Not a Science

The word “science” comes from the Latin word “scientia,” meaning knowledge. In the first book of his Sentences, Peter Lombard raises the issue of whether and in what sense theology is a science. Most philosophers commenting on the Sentences found a way to cast faith as a way of knowing. Ockham, however, makes no such effort. As a staunch empiricist, Ockham is committed to the thesis that all knowledge comes from experience. Yet we have no experience of God. It follows inescapably that we have no knowledge of God, as Ockham affirms in the following passage:

In order to demonstrate the statement of faith that we formulate about God, what we would need for the central concept is a simple cognition of the divine nature in itself—what someone who sees God has. Nevertheless, we cannot have this kind of cognition in our present state. [Quodlibetal Questions, pp. 103-4]

By “present state” Ockham is referring to life on earth as a human being. Just as we now have knowledge of others through intuitive cognitions of their individual essences, those who go to heaven (if there ever are any such) will have knowledge of God through intuitive cognitions of his essence. Until then we can only hope.

ii. The Trinity is a Logical Contradiction

The Trinity is the core Christian doctrine according to which God is three persons in one. Christians traditionally consider the Trinity a mystery, meaning that it is beyond the comprehension of the human mind. Ockham goes so far as to admit that it is a blatant contradiction. He displays the problem through the following syllogism:

According to the doctrine of the Trinity:

(1) God is the Father,


(2) Jesus is God.

Therefore, by transitivity, according to the doctrine of the Trinity:

(3) Jesus is the Father.

Yet, according to the doctrine of the Trinity, Jesus is not the Father.

So, according to the doctrine of the Trinity, Jesus both is and is not the Father.

Providing precedent for a recent presidential defense, many medieval philosophers suggested that the transitive inference to the conclusion is broken by different senses of the word “is.” Scotus creatively argues that the logic of the Trinity is an opaque context that does not obey the usual rules. For Ockham, however, this syllogism establishes that theology is not logical and must never be mixed with philosophy.

iii. There Is No Evidence of Purpose in the Natural World

Living prior to the advent of Christianity, Aristotle never believed in the Trinity. He does, however, seem to believe in a supernatural force that lends purpose to all of nature. This is evident in his doctrine of the Four Causes, according to which every existing thing requires a fourfold explanation. Ockham would cast these four causes in terms of the following four questions:

First Cause: What is it made of?
Second Cause: What does it do?
Third Cause: What brought it about?
Fourth Cause: Why does it do what it does?

Most medieval philosophers found Aristotle’s four causes conducive to the Christian worldview, assimilating the fourth cause to the doctrine of divine providence, according to which everything that happens is ultimately part of God’s plan.

Though Ockham was reluctant to disagree with Aristotle, he was so determined to keep theology separate from science and philosophy, that he felt compelled to criticize the fourth (which he calls “final”) cause. Ockham writes,

If I accepted no authority, I would claim that it cannot be proved either from statements known in themselves or from experience that every effect has a final cause.... Someone who is just following natural reason would claim that the question “why?” is inappropriate in the case of natural actions. For he would maintain that it is no real question to ask something like, “For what reason is fire generated?” [Quodlibetal Questions, pp. 246-9]

No doubt Ockham put his criticism in hypothetical, third-person terms because he knew that openly asserting that the universe itself may be entirely purposeless would never pass muster with the powers that be.

b. Against the Proofs of God’s Existence

Needless to say, Ockham rejects all of the alleged proofs of the existence of God. Two of the most important proofs then, as now, were Anselm’s ontological proof and Thomas Aquinas’s cosmological proof. Although the former is based on rationalist thinking and the latter is based on empiricist thinking, they boil down to very similar strategies, in Ockham’s view. There were, of course, many different versions of each of these proofs circulating in Ockham’s day just as there are today. Ockham thinks that the most plausible version of each boils down to an infinite regress argument of the following form:

If God does not exist, then there is an infinite regress.
But infinite regresses are impossible.
Therefore, God must exist.

The reason Ockham finds this argument form to be the most plausible is that he fully agrees with the second premise, that infinite regresses are impossible. If it were possible to show that God’s non-existence implied an infinite regress, then Ockham would accept the inference to his existence. Ockham denies, however, that God’s non-existence implies any such thing.

In order to understand Ockham’s aversion to infinite regress, it is necessary to understand Aristotle’s distinction between extensive and intensive infinity. An extensive infinity is an uncountable quantity of actually existing things. Mathematical Platonists conceive of the set of whole numbers as an extensive infinity. Ockham, however, deems the idea of an uncountable quantity contradictory: if the objects exist, then God can count them, and if God can count them, then they are not uncountable. An intensive infinity, on the other hand, is just a lack of limitation. As a nominalist, Ockham understands the set of whole numbers to be an intensive infinity in the sense that there is no upward limit on how far someone can count. This does not mean that the set of whole numbers are an uncountable quantity of actually existing things. Ockham thinks that infinite regresses are impossible only in so far as they imply extensive infinity.

i. The Ontological Proof

According to Ockham, advocates of the ontological proof reason as follows: There would be an infinite regress among entities if there were not one greatest entity. Therefore, there must be one greatest entity, namely God.

One way to counter this reasoning would be to deny that greatness is an objectively existing quality. Ockham does not, however, take this approach. On the contrary, he seems to take the Great Chain of Being for granted. The Great Chain of Being is a doctrine prevalent throughout the Middle Ages and beyond. According to it, all of nature can be ranked on a hierarchy of value from top to bottom, roughly as follows: God, angels, humans, animals, plants, rocks. The Great Chain of Being implies that greatness is an objectively existing quality.

Ockham’s curt response to the ontological argument is that it does not prove that there is just one greatest entity. Bearing the Great Chain of Being in mind, it is evident what he means to say. If God and the angels do not exist, then human beings are the greatest entities, and there is no single best among us. Notice that, even if there were a single best among humans, he or she would be a “god” in a very different sense than is required by Catholic orthodoxy.

Some scholars have interpreted Ockham to mean that the ontological argument succeeds in proving that the Father, the Son, and the Holy Ghost exist, but not that they are one. It is not clear, however, how Ockham’s empiricism could permit such a conclusion.

ii. The Cosmological Proof

According to Ockham, advocates of the cosmological argument reason as follows: There would be an infinite regress among causes if there were not a first cause; therefore, there must be a first cause, namely, God.

There are two different ways to understand “cause” in this argument: efficient cause and conserving cause. An efficient cause brings about an effect successively over time. For example, your grandparents were the efficient cause of your parents who were the efficient cause of you. A conserving cause, in contrast, is a simultaneous support for an effect. For example, the oxygen in the room is a conserving cause of the burning flame on the candle.

In Ockham’s view, the cosmological argument fails using either type of causality. Consider efficient causality first. If the chain of efficient causes that have produced the world as we know it today had no beginning, then it would form, not an extensive infinity, but an intensive infinity, which is harmless. Since the links in the chain would not all exist at the same time, they would not constitute an uncountable quantity of actually existing things. Rather, they would simply imply that the universe is an eternal cycle of unlimited or perpetual motion. Ockham explicitly affirms that it is possible that the world had no beginning, as Aristotle maintained.

Next, consider conserving causality. Conceiving of the world as a product of simultaneous conserving causes is difficult. The idea is perhaps best expressed in a story reported by Stephen Hawking. According to the story, a scientist was giving a lecture on astronomy. After the lecture, an elderly lady came up and told the scientist that he had it all wrong. “The world is really a flat plate supported on the back of a giant tortoise.” The scientist asked “And what is the turtle standing on?” To which the lady triumphantly replied: “You’re very clever, young man, but it’s no use – it’s turtles all the way down.”

Ockham readily grants that if the world has to be “held up” by conserving causes, then there must be a first among them because otherwise the set of conserving causes would constitute an uncountable quantity of actually existing things. It is in fact a tenet of belief that God is both an efficient and conserving cause of the cosmos, and Ockham accepts this tenet on faith. He handily points out, however, that, just as the cosmos need not have a beginning; it need not be “held up” in this way at all. Each existing thing may be its own conserving cause. Hence the cosmological argument is entirely inconclusive.

Ockham’s fideism amounts to a refusal to rely on the God hypothesis for theory building. It is worth bearing in mind that there were no philosophy departments or philosophy degrees in the Middle Ages. A student’s only choices for graduate school were law, medicine, or theology. Wanting to be a philosopher, Ockham studied theology and ran through his theological exercises, all the while trying to carve out a separate space for philosophy. The one area where the two worlds collide inextricably for him is in ethics.

7. Ethics

a. Divine Command Theory

Many people think God commands human beings to be kind because kindness is good and that God himself is always kind because his actions are always in conformity with goodness.

Although this was and still is the most common way of conceiving of the relationship between God and morality, Ockham disagrees. In his view, God does not conform to an independently existing standard of goodness; rather, God himself is the standard of goodness. This means it is not the case that God commands us to be kind because kindness is good. Rather, kindness is good because God commands it. Ockham was a divine command theorist: God’s will establishes right and wrong.

Divine command theory has always been unpopular because it carries one very unintuitive implication: if whatever God commands becomes right, and God can command whatever he wants, then God could command us always to be unkind and never to be kind, and then it would be right for us to be unkind and wrong for us to be kind. Kindness would be bad and unkindness would be good! How could this be?

In Ockham’s view, God always has commanded and always will command kindness. Nevertheless, it is possible for him to command otherwise. This possibility is a straightforward requirement of divine omnipotence: God can do anything that does not involve a contradiction. Of course, plenty of philosophers, such as Thomas Aquinas, insist that it is impossible for God to command us to be unkind simply because then God’s will would contradict his nature. For Ockham, however, this is the wrong way to conceive of God’s nature. The most important thing to understand about God’s nature, in Ockham’s view, is that it is maximally free. There are no constraints, external or internal, to what God can will. All of theology stands or falls with this thesis in Ockham’s view.

Ockham grants that it is hard to imagine a world in which God reverses his commands. Yet this is the price of preserving divine freedom. He writes,

I reply that hatred, theft, adultery, and the like may involve evil according to the common law, in so far as they are done by someone who is obligated by a divine command to perform the opposite act. As far as everything absolute in these actions is concerned, however, God can perform them without involving any evil. And they can even be performed meritoriously by someone on earth if they should fall under a divine command, just as now the opposite of these, in fact, fall under a divine command. [Opera Theologica V, p. 352]

One advantage of this approach is that it enables Ockham to make sense of some instances in the Old Testament where it looks as though God is commanding such things as murder (as in the case of Abraham sacrificing Isaac) and deception (as in the case of the Israelites despoiling the Egyptians). But biblical exegesis is not Ockham’s motive. His motive is to cast God as a paradigm of metaphysical freedom, so that he can make sense of human nature as made in his image.

b. Metaphysical Libertarianism

Metaphysical libertarianism is the view that human beings are responsible for their actions as individuals because they have free will, defined as the ability to do other than they do. Metaphysical libertarianism is opposed to determinism, according to which human beings do not have free will but rather are determined by antecedent conditions (such as God or nature or environmental factors) to do exactly what they do.

Suppose Jake eats a cupcake. According to the determinist, antecedent conditions caused him to do this. Hence, he could not have done otherwise unless those antecedent conditions had been different. Given the same conditions, Jake cannot refrain from eating the cupcake. Determinists are content to conclude that freedom is an illusion.

Compatibilism is a version of determinism according to which being determined to do exactly what we do is compatible with freedom as long as the antecedent conditions that determine what we do include our own choices. Compatibilists claim that the choices we make are free even though we could not do otherwise given the same antecedent conditions. On this view, Jake chose to eat the cupcake because his desire for it outweighed all other considerations at that moment. Our choices are always determined by our strongest desires according to compatibilists.

Metaphysical libertarians reject determinism and compatibilism, insisting that free will includes the ability to act against our strongest desires. On this view, Jake could have refrained from eating the cupcake even given the exact same antecedent conditions. While desires influence our choices they do not cause our choices according to metaphysical libertarianism; rather, our choices are caused by our will which is itself an uncaused cause, meaning that it is an independent power, stronger than any antecedent condition. This notion of free will enables the metaphysical libertarian to assign a very strong conception of individual responsibility to human beings: what we do is not attributable to God or nature or environmental factors.

Many people make the assumption that all medieval philosophers were metaphysical libertarians. Whereas Protestant theology classically promotes theological determinism, the view that everything human beings do is foreordained by God, Catholic theology classically promotes the view that God gave human beings free will. While it is true that every medieval philosopher endorses the thesis that human beings are free, few are able to maintain a commitment to free will, defined as the ability to do other than we do given the same antecedent conditions. The reason is that so many other theological and philosophical doctrines conflict with it.

Consider divine foreknowledge. If God is omniscient, then he knows everything that you are ever going to do. Suppose he knows that you will eat an apple for lunch tomorrow. How then is it possible for you to choose not to eat an apple for lunch tomorrow? Even if God does not force you in any way, it seems his present knowledge of your future requires that your choices are already determined.

Medieval philosophers struggle with this and other conflicts with free will. Most give up on metaphysical libertarianism in favor of some form of compatibilism. This is to say they maintain that our choices are free even though they are determined by antecedent conditions.

In his Sentences Commentary, Peter John Olivi makes a long and impassioned argument for an unadulterated metaphysical libertarian conception of free will. Ockham embraces Olivi’s position without ever making much of an argument for it. In Ockham’s view, we experience freedom. We can no more dismiss this experience than we can dismiss our experience of the external world. Ockham goes to great lengths to adjust his account of divine foreknowledge and anything else that might otherwise threaten free will in order to accommodate it. He writes,

The will is freely able to will something and not to will it. By this I mean that it is able to destroy the willing that it has and produce anew a contrary effect, or it is equally able in itself to continue that same effect and not produce a new one. It is able to do all of this without any prior change in the intellect, or in the will, or in something outside them. The idea is that the will is equal for producing and not producing because, with no difference in antecedent conditions, it is able to produce and not to produce. It is poised equally over contrary effects in such a way in fact, that it is able to cause love or hatred of something.... To deny every agent this equal or contrary power is to destroy every praise and blame, every council and deliberation, every freedom of the will. Indeed, without it, the will would not make a human being free any more than appetite does an ass. [Opera Philosophica, pp. 319-21]

Ockham’s reference to an ass here is significant in connection with the famous thought experiment known as Buridan’s Ass.

Jean Buridan was a younger contemporary of Ockham’s. Although he embraced and elaborated Ockham’s nominalism, he openly rejected metaphysical libertarianism, arguing that the human intellect determines the human will. He may have engaged in a public debate with Ockham over the nature of human freedom. At any rate, his name somehow became associated with the following thought experiment.

Imagine a hungry donkey poised between two equally delicious piles of hay. The donkey has reason to eat the hay, but because he caught sight of both piles at the same time, he has no more reason to approach one pile than the other. For lack of any way to break the tie, the donkey starves to death. A human being, in contrast, would never make such an ass of himself. The reason is that, in human beings, the will is not determined by the intellect. Free will is the uniquely human dignity that enables us to break the tie between two equally reasonable options.

The French philosopher Pierre Bale (1647-1706) is the first on record to call this thought experiment “Buridan’s Ass.” Although Buridan mentions the case of a dog poised between food and water, he never discusses the case of the donkey in connection with freedom. It is therefore somewhat of a puzzle why the thought experiment is named after him. Interestingly, Peter John Olivi does discuss the case of the donkey in connection with freedom, and we see Ockham echoing that text here.

So, in the end, Ockham’s ethics is dictated by his empiricism. We experience free will. Therefore, free will is at the core of human nature. Theology tells us that we are made in God’s image. Therefore, free will is at the core of God’s nature. But theology also tells us that God is always good. Therefore, God’s free will must be the objective determinant of goodness.

Setting aside his divine command theory, Ockham’s ethics is rather unremarkable, coming to more or less the same thing as that of his colleagues who reject divine command theory. One might think Ockham takes a long way around the barn just to arrive at yet another conventional account of Christian virtue! But Ockham never minds taking the long way around for the sake of consistency. We see the same unflagging determination in his political theory

8. Political Theory

Although Ockham was summoned to the papal court in Avignon to defend a number of “suspect theses” extracted from his work, largely concerning the sacrament of the altar, he was never found guilty of heresy, and his conflict with the papacy ultimately had nothing to do with the sacrament of the altar. While staying in Avignon, Ockham met Michael Cesena (1270-1342), the Minister General of the Franciscan Order, who was there in protest of the Pope’s recent pronouncements about the Franciscan vow of poverty. Michael asked Ockham to study these pronouncements, whereupon Ockham joined the protest and soon became irretrievably entangled in a political imbroglio. Leaving academia behind for good, he nevertheless marshaled his central philosophical insights into the debate. While Ockham was not allowed to publish his political treatises, they circulated widely underground, indirectly influencing major developments in political thought.

a. Rights

Who would have guessed that at the root of these developments lay the Franciscan vow of poverty? In Matthew 19, Jesus says to a man, “If you wish to be perfect, go, sell all you have, give your money to the poor, and come, and follow me.” The man who was to become St. Francis of Assisi (1182-1226) took these instructions personally. Raised in a wealthy family, St. Francis gave up the worldly life, founding the Order of the Friar Minor, and requiring all its members to take a vow of poverty. From the very beginning there was controversy over what exactly this vow entailed. By the 1320s, various factions had come to the breaking point.

Michael Cesena promoted the “radical” interpretation, according to which Franciscans should not only live simply but also own nothing, not even the robes on their backs. Pope Nicholas III (1210/1220-1280) had sanctioned this interpretation by arranging for the papacy officially to possess everything that the Franciscans used, including the very food they ate. Living in absolute poverty enabled the Franciscans to preach convincingly against avarice, and, much to the chagrin of Pope John XXII (1244-1334), raise questions about the ever-expanding papal palace in Avignon.

John was determined to amass great wealth for the church and the Franciscan vow of poverty was getting in the way. Trained as a lawyer, John worked up a good argument for revoking Nicholas’s arrangement. Given that the Franciscans enjoyed exclusive use of the donations they received, they were the de facto owners. Papal “ownership” of Franciscan property was ownership in name alone.

As a nominalist, however, Ockham was in an excellent position to show why reducing something to a name is not the same as reducing it to nothing at all. A name is a mental concept, and a mental concept is an intention. Ockham set out to show that the intention to use is distinct from the intention to own.

Ockham derives his definition of ownership from metaphysical libertarianism. Ownership is not just a conventional relationship established through social agreement. It is a natural relationship that arises through the act of making something of your own free will. Free will naturally confers ownership because it implies sole responsibility. Suppose you freely make a choice. Since you could have done otherwise, you are the true cause of the result. To own something is to do what you will with it.

The Franciscans do not do as they will with the donations given to them, according to Ockham, but rather as the owner wills. They are therefore merely using the donations and do not own them. Granted, in normal practice, this distinction may be entirely undetectable, because the will of the owner matches that of the user. But if a conflict of wills should arise, the distinction would become readily apparent. Suppose someone donates some cloth to the Order intending it to be used for robes. The friars must use it for robes even if they would rather use it for something else. And if the donor wants the cloth back even after it is made into robes, the friars will have no basis for refusing and no legal recourse. Ockham puts the crucial point in terms of crucial language: the owner retains a right (ius) to what he owns.

The notion of a right is one of the most important features of modern political theory. Its emergence in the history of Western thought is a long and complicated story. Nevertheless, the Franciscan poverty debate is standardly considered an important watershed, in which Ockham played a significant role.

b. Separation of Church and State

Ockham extends his commitment to poverty beyond just the Franciscan order, convinced that wealth is an inappropriate source of power for the Catholic Church as a whole. In his view, the Catholic Church has a spiritual power which sets it apart from the secular world. This conviction leads Ockham to propose the doctrine that was to become the foundation of the United States Constitution: separation of church and state.

Throughout the Middle Ages, popes and emperors vied for supremacy across Europe. The political momentum was split in two directions and it was not at all clear which way things would go. One side pushed for hierocracy, where the pope, as the highest authority, appoints the emperor. The other side pushed for imperialism, where the emperor, as the highest authority, appoints the pope. Often the pushing came to shoving; it seemed there would be no end to the ill will and bloodshed.

Ockham boldly proposes a third alternative: the pope and the emperor should be separate but equal, each supreme in his own domain. This was an outrageous suggestion, unwelcome on both sides. Ockham’s argument for it stems from reflections that foreshadow the “state of nature” thought experiments of premier modern political theorists Thomas Hobbes (1588-1679), John Locke (1632-1704) and Jean-Jacques Rousseau (1712-1778).

In the Garden of Eden, God gave the earth to human beings to use to their common benefit. As long as we were willing to share there was no need for property among us. After the fall, however, human beings became selfish and exploitative. Laws became necessary to restrain immoderate appetite for secular or “temporal” goods and to prevent the neglect of their management. Since laws are useless without the ability to enforce them, we arrived at the need for secular power. The function of the secular power is to punish law breakers and in general coerce everyone into obeying the law.

By renouncing property, the Franciscans were attempting to live as God originally intended. In a perfect world, there would be no need for property and the coercive authority it spawns. All Christians should aspire to this anarchic utopia, even though they may never fully achieve it. In the meanwhile, they should avoid mixing the spiritual and the secular as much as possible. Ockham writes,

For this reason, the head of Christians does not, as a rule, have power to punish secular wrongs with a capital penalty and other bodily penalties and it is for thus punishing such wrongs that temporal power and riches are chiefly necessary; such punishment is granted chiefly to the secular power. The pope therefore, can, as a rule, correct wrongdoers only with a spiritual penalty. It is not, therefore, necessary that he should excel in temporal power or abound in temporal riches, but it is enough that Christians should willingly obey him. [A Letter to the Friars Minor and other Writings, p. 204]

For Ockham, the separation of church and state is a separation of the ideal and the real.

Ockham mentions democracy only in passing, arguing in favor of monarchy as the best form of secular government. Moreover, he finds representational forms of government objectionable on the grounds that there is no such thing as a common will. Ockham is not holding out for a superhuman leader. On the contrary, he seems to think that a fairly ordinary, good man can make a decent king. One wonders if Louis of Bavaria, to whose protection he and Michael fled, inspired this confidence. Perhaps Ockham is content with monarchy because, in his view, the secular world will always be intrinsically flawed. He sets his hopes instead on the spiritual world, and this is why he was so bitterly disappointed in Pope John XXII.

c. Freedom of Speech

Ockham’s battle with the papacy continued after John’s death through two successive popes. Although Ockham never came to criticize the institution of the papacy itself, as would later Protestant thinkers, he did accuse the popes he opposed of heresy and called for their expulsion. Ironically, Ockham’s extensive analysis of the concept of heresy turns into a defense of free speech.

In keeping with his doctrine of the separation of church and state, Ockham maintains that the pope, and only the pope, has the right to level spiritual penalties, and only spiritual penalties, against someone who knowingly asserts theological falsehoods and refuses to be corrected. A man might unknowingly assert a theological falsehood a thousand times, however. As long as he is willing to be corrected, he should not be judged a heretic, especially by the pope.

Ockham’s political treatises are strewn with biblical exegesis, often glaringly ad hoc and sometimes quite interesting, as in the present case. In Matthew 28:20 Jesus promises his disciples: “I will be with you always, to the end of the age.” This text traditionally provided justification for the doctrine of papal infallibility according to which the pope cannot be wrong when speaking about official church matters. Ockham rejects this doctrine, however, arguing that the minimum required for Jesus to keep his promise is that one human being remain faithful at any given time, and this one could be anyone, even a single baptized infant. This implies that the entire institution of the church could become completely corrupt. As a result, any theological claim, no matter how ancient or universally accepted, is always open for dispute.

Even more interesting, however, is Ockham’s view of non-theological speech. He writes that

...purely philosophical assertions which do not pertain to theology should not be solemnly condemned or forbidden by anyone, because in connection with such assertions anyone at all ought to be free to say freely what pleases him, [Dialogus, I.2.22]

This statement long predates the Areopagitica of John Milton (1608-1674), which is typically heralded as the earliest defense of free speech in Western history.

Ockham’s contributions in political thought are less known and appreciated than they may have been if he had been able to publish them. Likewise, there is no telling what he might have accomplished in philosophy if he had been allowed to carry on with his academic career. Ockham was ahead of his time. His role in history was to make way for new ideas, boldly planting seeds that grew and flourished after his death.

9. References and Further Reading

a. Ockham’s Works in Latin

  • William of Ockham, 1967-88. Opera philosophica et theologica. Gedeon Gál, et al., ed. 17 vols. St. Bonaventure, N. Y.: The Franciscan Institute.
  • William of Ockham, 1956-97. Opera politica. H. S. Offler, et al. ed. 4 vols. Vols. 1-3, Manchester: Manchester University Press, 1956-74. Vol. 4, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1997.
  • William of Ockham, 1995-still in progress. Dialogus. John Kilcullen and John Scott, et al. ed. & trans.

b.Ockham’s Works in English Translation

  • Adams, Marilyn McCord, and Norman Kretzmann, trans. 1983. William of Ockham: Predestination, God’s Foreknowledge, and Future Contingents. 2nd ed. Indianapolis: Hackett.
  • Birch, T. Bruce, ed. & trans. 1930. The De sacramento altaris of William of Ockham. Burlington, Iowa: Lutheran Literary Board.
  • Boehner, Philotheus, ed. & trans. 1990. William of Ockham: Philosophical Writings. Rev. ed. Indianapolis, Ind.: Hackett.
  • Davies, Julian, trans. 1989. Ockham on Aristotle’s Physics: A Translation of Ockham’s Brevis Summa Libri Physicorum. St. Bonaventure, N. Y.: The Franciscan Institute.
  • Freddoso, Alfred J., and Francis E. Kelly, trans. 1991. Quodlibetal Questions. New Haven, Conn.: Yale University Press.
  • Freddoso, Alfred J., and Henry Schuurman, trans. 1980. Ockham’s Theory of Propositions: Part II of the Summa logicae. Notre Dame, Ind.: University of Notre Dame Press.
  • Kilcullen, John, and John Scott, ed. & trans. 1995-still in progress. Dialogue on the Power of the Emperor and the Pope.
  • Kluge, Eike-Henner W., trans. 1973-74. “William of Ockham’s Commentary on Porphyry: Introduction and English Translation.” Franciscan Studies 33, pp. 171-254, and 34, pp. 306-82.
  • Loux, Michael J. 1974. Ockham’s Theory of Terms: Part I of the Summa Logicae. Notre Dame, Ind.: University of Notre Dame Press.
  • McGrade, A. S., and John Kilcullen, ed. & trans. 1992. A Short Discourse on the Tyrannical Government over Things Divine and Human. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • McGrade, A. S., and John Kilcullen, ed. & trans. 1995. A Letter to the Friars Minor and Other Writings. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Spade, Paul Vincent, 1994. Five Texts on the Mediaeval Problem of Universals: Porphyry, Boethius, Abelard, Duns Scotus, Ockham. Indianapolis, Ind.: Hackett.
  • Wood, Rega, trans. 1997. Ockham on the Virtues. West Lafayette, Ind.: Purdue University Press.

c. Books about Ockham

  • Adams, Marilyn McCord, 1987. William Ockham. 2 vols., Notre Dame, Ind.: University of Notre Dame Press. (2nd rev. ed., 1989.)
  • Copleston, F.C., 1953. History of Philosophy, Volume III: Ockham to Suarez. London: Search Press.
  • Goddu, André, 1984. The Physics of William of Ockham. Leiden: E. J. Brill.
  • Hirvonen, Vesa, 2004. Passions in William Ockham’s Philosophical Psychology. Dordrecht: Kluwer.
  • Kaye, Sharon M. and Robert Martin, 2001. On Ockham. Belmont: Wadsworth.
  • Maurer, Armand, 1999. The Philosophy of William of Ockham in the Light of its Principles. Toronto: Pontifical Institute of Medieval Studies.
  • McGrade, A. S., 1974. The Political Thought of William of Ockham. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Spade, Paul, ed., 1999. The Cambridge Companion to Ockham. New York: Cambridge University Press.
  • Panaccio, Claude, 2004. Ockham on Concepts. Burlington: Ashgate.
  • Tauchau, Katherine H., 1988. Vision and Certitude in the Age of Ockham: Optics, Epistemology and the Foundations of Semantics, 1250-1345. Leiden: E. J. Brill.

Author Information

Sharon Kaye
John Carroll University
U. S. A.

Anselm of Canterbury (1033—1109)

anselmSaint Anselm was one of the most important Christian thinkers of the eleventh century. He is most famous in philosophy for having discovered and articulated the so-called “ontological argument;” and in theology for his doctrine of the atonement. However, his work extends to many other important philosophical and theological matters, among which are: understanding the aspects and the unity of the divine nature; the extent of our possible knowledge and understanding of the divine nature; the complex nature of the will and its involvement in free choice; the interworkings of human willing and action and divine grace; the natures of truth and justice; the natures and origins of virtues and vices; the nature of evil as negation or privation; and the condition and implications of original sin.

In the course of his work and thought, unlike most of his contemporaries, Anselm deployed argumentation that was in most respects only indirectly dependent on Sacred Scripture, Christian doctrine, and tradition. Anselm also developed sophisticated analyses of the language used in discussion and investigation of philosophical and theological issues, highlighting the importance of focusing on the meaning of the terms used rather than allowing oneself to be misled by the verbal forms, and examining the adequacy of the language to the objects of investigation, particularly to the divine nature. In addition, in his work he both discussed and exemplified the resolution of apparent contradictions or paradoxes by making appropriate distinctions. For these reasons, one title traditionally accorded him is the Scholastic Doctor, since his approach to philosophical and theological matters both represents and contributed to early medieval Christian Scholasticism.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Influences
  3. Methodology: Faith and Reason
  4. The Proslogion
  5. Gaunilo’s Reply and Anselm’s Response
  6. The Monologion
  7. Cur Deus Homo
  8. De Grammatico
  9. The De Veritate
  10. The De Libertate Arbitrii
  11. The De Casu Diaboli
  12. The De Concordia
  13. The Fragments
  14. Other Writings
  15. References and Further Readings
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Life

Anselm was born in 1033 in Aosta, a border town of the kingdom of Burgundy. In his adolescence, he decided that there was no better life than the monastic one. He sought to become a monk, but was refused by the abbot of the local monastery. Leaving his birthplace as a young man, he headed north across the Alps to France, eventually arriving at Bec in Normandy, where he studied under the eminent theologian and dialectician Lanfranc, whose involvement in disputes with Berengar spurred a revival in theological speculation and application of dialectic in theological argument. At the monastery of Bec, Anselm devoted himself to scholarship, and found an earlier childhood attraction to the monastic life reawakening. Unable to decide between becoming a monk at Bec or Cluny, becoming a hermit, or living off his inheritance and giving alms to the poor, he put the decision in the hands of Lanfranc and Maurilius, the Archbishop of Rouen, who decided Anselm should enter monastic life at Bec, which he did in 1060.

In 1063, after Lanfranc left Bec for Caen, Anselm was chosen to be prior. Among the various tasks Anselm took on as prior was that of instructing the monks, but he also had time left for carrying on rigorous spiritual exercises, which would play a great role in his philosophical and theological development. As his biographer, Eadmer, writes: “being continually given up to God and to spiritual exercises, he attained such a height of divine speculation that he was able by God’s help to see into and unravel many most obscure and previously insoluble questions…” (1962, p. 12). He became particularly well known, both in the monastic community and in the wider community, not only for the range and depth of his insight into human nature, the virtues and vices, and the practice of moral and religious life, but also for the intensity of his devotions and asceticism.

In 1070, Anselm began to write, particularly prayers and meditations, which he sent to monastic friends and to noblewomen for use in their own private devotions. He also engaged in a great deal of correspondence, leaving behind numerous letters. Eventually, his teaching and thinking culminated in a set of treatises and dialogues. In 1077, he produced the Monologion, and in 1078 the Proslogion. Eventually, Anselm was elected abbot of the monastery. At some time while still at Bec, Anselm wrote the De Veritate (On Truth), De Libertate Arbitrii (On Freedom of Choice), De Casu Diaboli (On the Fall of the Devil), and De Grammatico.

In 1092, Anselm traveled to England, where Lanfranc had previously been arch-bishop of Canterbury. The Episcopal seat had been kept vacant so King William Rufus could collect its income, and Anselm was proposed as the new bishop, a prospect neither the king nor Anselm desired. Eventually, the king fell ill, changed his mind in fear of his demise, and nominated Anselm to become bishop. Anselm attempted to argue his unfitness for the post, but eventually accepted. In addition to the typical cares of the office, his tenure as arch-bishop of Canterbury was marked by nearly uninterrupted conflict over numerous issues with King William Rufus, who attempted not only to appropriate church lands, offices, and incomes, but even to have Anselm deposed. Anselm had to go into exile and travel to Rome to plead the case of the English church to the Pope, who not only affirmed Anselm’s position, but refused Anselm’s own request to be relieved of his office. While archbishop in exile, however, Anselm did finish his Cur Deus Homo, also writing the treatises Epistolae de Incarnatione Verbi (On the Incarnation of the Word), De Conceptu Virginali et de Originali Peccato (On the Virgin Conception and on Original Sin), De Processione Spiritus Sancti (On the Proceeding of the Holy Spirit), and De Concordia Praescientia et Praedestinationis et Gratiae Dei cum Libero Arbitrio (On the Harmony of the Foreknowledge, the Predestination, and the Grace of God with Free Choice).

Upon returning to England after William Rufus’s death, conflict eventually ensued between the archbishop and the new king, Henry I, requiring Anselm once again to travel to Rome. When judgment was made by Pope Paschal II in Anselm’s favor, the king forbade him to return to England, but eventually reconciliation took place. Anselm died in 1109, leaving behind several pupils and friends of some importance, among them Eadmer, Anselm’s biographer, and the theologian Gilbert Crispin. He was declared a doctor of the Roman Catholic Church in 1720, and is considered a saint by the Roman Catholic Church and the churches in the Anglican Communion.

Today, Anselm is most well known for his Proslogion proof for the existence of God, but his thought was widely known in the Middle Ages, and still today in certain circles of scholarship, particularly among religious scholars, for considerably more than that single achievement. For fuller biographies of Anselm, see Eadmer’s Vita Sancti AnselmiThe Life of St. Anselm: Archbishop of Canterbury, and Alexander’s Liber ex dictis beati Anselmi.

2. Influences

With the exception of St. Augustine, and to a lesser extent Boethius, it is difficult to definitively ascribe the influence of other thinkers to the development of St. Anselm’s thought. To be sure, Anselm studied under Lanfranc, but Lanfranc does not appear to have been a significant influence on the actual content or expression of Anselm’s thought, and he largely ignored Lanfranc’s misgivings about the method of theMonologion. Anselm cites Boethius, but does not draw upon him extensively. Other figures have been proposed as influences on Anselm, for instance John Scotus Eriugena and Pseudo-Dionysus, but any such proposals are set in the proper framework by these remarks from Koyré: “The influence of these two great thinkers is not at all lacking in verisimilitude a priori.” (Koyré 1923, 109). It is possible that either one of them, or other thinkers, influenced Anselm, but going beyond mere possibility given the texts we possess is controversial.

Discerning influences on Anselm’s work is for the most part conjectural, precisely because Anselm makes so few references to previous thinkers in his work. In the preface to the Monologion he writes: “Reexamining the work often myself, I have been able to find nothing that I have said in it, that would not agree [cohaereat] with the writings of the Catholic Fathers and especially with those of the blessed Augustine.” (S. v. 1, p.8)

[All citations of Anselm’s texts (except for the Fragments) are the author’s translations from S. Anselmi Cantuariensis Archepiscopi Opera Omnia, abbreviated here as S., followed by (when needed) the volume and the page numbers. Latin terms in brackets or parentheses have been romanized to current orthography. All citations of the Fragments are the author’s translations from the Ein neues unvollendetes Werk des heilige Anselm von Canterbury, henceforth abbreviated as u.W.]

Anselm references Augustine’s On the Holy Trinity, but as a whole work, giving no specific references. Clearly, Augustine was a major influence on Anselm’s thought, but that is in itself rather unremarkable, since practically all of his contemporaries fit in one way or another into the broad stream of the Augustinian tradition. As Southern summarizes the issues: “[T]he ambivalence of Anselm’s relations to St. Augustine remains one of the mysteries of his mind and personality. Augustine’s thought was the pervading atmosphere in which Anselm moved; but he was never content merely to reproduce Augustine.” (1963, 32)

In fact, one of the most important features of Anselm’s work is its originality. As Southern has also pointed out, this originality was not confined to the treatises and dialogues. In his more devotional prayers and meditations, Anselm adapted traditional forms to new content, (1963, 34-47) “open[ing] the way which led to the Dies Irae, the Imitatio Christi, and the masterpieces of later medieval piety.” (1963, 47) Although clearly indebted to an Augustinian (neo)-Platonic tradition often termed “Christian philosophy,” Anselm’s originality clearly furthered and expanded that tradition, and prepared the way for later Scholasticism. The term “Christian philosophy” was used in a variety of senses, particularly within and to denote the Augustinian tradition, and was applied to Anselm’s work by numerous interpreters. A set of debates, which gave rise to a sizable literature, and which are still to some extent being continued today, took place in Francophone circles (spreading to German, Italian, Spanish, and English-speaking circles in later years) in the early 1930s, about the nature and possibility of “Christian philosophy.” One of the main participants, Etienne Gilson, in fact used Anselm’s formula fides quaerens intellectum several times as one of the definitions of Christian philosophy.

Anselm’s work was influential for some of his contemporaries, and has continued to exercise influence in varying ways on philosophers and theologians to the present day. The so-called “ontological argument” has had numerous critics, defenders, and adaptors philosophically or theologically notable in their own right, among them St. Bonaventure, St. Thomas Aquinas, Descartes, Gassendi, Spinoza, Malebranche, Locke, Leibniz, Kant, Hegel, and an even greater number in the last century, not least of which were Charles Hartshorne, Etienne Gilson, Maurice Blondel, Martin Heidegger, Karl Barth, Norman Malcolm, and Alvin Plantinga. However, the “argument”(s) discussed in this literature are frequently not precisely what is found in Anselm’s texts, and a sizable literature has developed addressing that very issue.

Argument(s) for God’s being or existence form only a small portion of Anselm’s considerable and complex work, and his influence has been much wider and deeper than originating one perennial line of philosophical investigation and discussion. In his own time, he had several gifted students, among them Anselm of Laon, Gilbert Crispin, Eadmer (writer of the Vita Anselmi), Alexander (writer of the Dicta Anselmi), and Honorius Augustodunensis. His works were copied and disseminated in his lifetime, and exercised an influence on later Scholastics, among them Bonaventure, Thomas Aquinas, John Duns Scotus, and William of Ockham. For further discussion of Anselm’s influence, cf. Châtillon, 1959, Southern, 1963, Rovighi, 1964, Hopkins, 1972, and Fortin, 2001.

3. Methodology: Faith and Reason

The extent to which Anselm’s work, and which portions of it, ought to be considered to be philosophy or theology (or “philosophical theology,” “Christian philosophy,” and so forth) is a long debated question. The answers (and their rationales) depend considerably on one’s conceptions of philosophy and theology and their distinction and interaction. These admittedly important issues are set aside here in order to focus on three key features of Anselm’s work: Anselm’s pedagogical motivation and his intended audience; the notion of faith seeking understanding (fides quaerens intellectum); and Anselm’s stylistics and dialectic.

Anselm provides a paradigmatic account of the pedagogical motive structuring his works in theMonologion’s Prologue.

Some of the brothers have often and earnestly entreated me to set down in writing for them some of the matters I have brought to light for them when we spoke together in our accustomed discourses, about how the divine essence ought to be meditated upon and certain other things pertaining to that sort of meditation, as a kind of model for meditation.... They prescribed this form for me: nothing whatsoever in these matters should be made convincing [persuaderetur] by the authority of Scripture, but whatsoever the conclusion [finis], through individual investigations, should assert...the necessity of reason would concisely prove [cogeret], and the clarity of truth would evidently show that this is the case. They also wished that I not disdain to meet and address [obviare] simpleminded and almost foolish objections that occurred to me. (S. v. 1, p.7)

The original audience for his writings was fellow Benedictine monks seeking a fuller understanding of the Christian faith and asking that Anselm provide an articulation of it in a form quite different than those typical and traditional of their time, namely, where such theological discussions were carried out primarily through citation and interpretation of Scripture and patristic authorities. Anselm expresses this pedagogical motive again in the Cur Deus Homo: “I have often and most earnestly been asked by many, in speech and in writing, to commit in writing to posterity [memoriae. . commendem] reasonable answers [rationes] I am accustomed to give to those asking about a certain question of our faith.” (S. v. 2, p.47)

The goal of Anselm’s treatises is not to provide a philosophical substitute for the Christian faith, nor to rationalize or systematize it solely in the light of natural reason. Rather, in the cases of the Monologionand Proslogion, he aims to treat meditatively, by reason’s resources, central aspects of the Christian faith, namely, as he puts it in the Proslogion’s Prologue: “that God truly is, and that he is the supreme good needing no other, and that he is what all things need so that they are and so that they are well, and whatever else we believe about the divine substance.” (S., v. 1, p. 93) In the other treatises (excepting theDe Grammatico, which he explicitly states to be for “beginners in dialectic,” and that it “pertains to a different subject matter than [Sacred Scripture],” S., v.1, p. 173), Anselm concerns himself with other important, and often interrelated, aspects of the Christian faith, developing the arguments through reasoning, rather than through explicit reliance on Scriptural or patristic authority in the course of argumentation. Over the course of his career, Anselm’s intended audience expands considerably, however, particularly as he became involved in controversy over the Trinity that culminated in hisEpistola de Incarnatione Verbi and Cur Deus Homo.

The Proslogion’s Prologue provides a somewhat different, but clearly related motive for its production. After the Monologion, Anselm writes: “considering that that work was constructed from an interlinking [concatenatione] of many arguments, I began to wonder if perhaps a single argument [unum argumentum] that needed nothing other than itself alone for proving itself.” (S., v. 1, p. 93) Once he had uncovered this unum argumentum (“single argument”) after great effort and difficulty, Anselm wrote about it and several other related topics, in the interest of sharing the joy it had brought him, or at least pleasing another who would read it (alicui legenti placiturum).

Precisely what this single argument consists of has been a subject of considerable scholarly debate. A fairly common but clearly incorrect interpretation of the “single argument” takes it as referring only to the proof for God’s existence or being in Chapter 2, or at most Chapters 2-4. At the other extreme, some commentators take the single argument to be the entirety of the Proslogion. A third, intermediary position argues that the unum argumentum is the entirety of the Proslogion, minus the last three chapters, for two reasons: 1) Anselm calls the last three chapters coniectationes; 2) Anselm says in the prooemium that he wrote the Proslogion about the argument itself (de hoc ipso) and about several other things (et de quibusdam aliis).

As Anselm explains to his interlocutor Boso, his writing the De Conceptu Virginali is motivated by a purpose similar to that of the Proslogion, reexamining and rearticulating topics previously addressed in other works.

For I am certain that when you read in the Cur Deus Homo. . . that, besides the one I set down there, another reason can be glimpsed [posse uideri], how God took on humanity without sin from the sinful mass of the human race, your most studious mind will be driven not a little to asking what this reason is. Accordingly, I feared that I would appear unjust to you if I conceal what I think on this [quod inde mihi videtur] from your enjoyment [dilectioni tuae]. (S., v. 2, p. 139)

The prologue to the three connected dialogues (De VeritateDe Libertate ArbitriiDe Casu Diaboli) does not indicate conclusively whether they were written to answer specific requests of the monks. Clearly, however, they treat matters of both theological and philosophical interest arising out of reflection and discussion on Christian faith, life, and thought.

Fides quaerens intellectum, “faith seeking understanding” was the Proslogion’s original title and is an apt designation for Anselm’s philosophical and theological projects as a whole. Anselm begins from, and never leaves the standpoint of a committed and practicing Catholic Christian, but this does not mean that his philosophical work is thereby vitiated as philosophy by operating on the basis of and within the confines of theological presuppositions. Rather, Anselm engages in philosophy, employing reasoning rather than appeal to Scriptural or patristic authority in order to establish the doctrines of the Christian faith (which, as a faithful and practicing believer, he takes as already established) in a different, but possible way, through the employment of reason. Faith seeking understanding goes beyond simply establishing faith’s doctrines, however, precisely because it seeks understanding, the rational intelligibility (as far as is possible) of the doctrines.

Anselm does cite Scripture at certain points in his work, as well as “what we believe” (quod credimus), but attention to his texts indicates that he does not rely on scriptural or doctrinal authority directly to resolve problems or to provide starting points for his reasoning. In some cases, he has the student or his own questioning voice (as in Proslogion, Chapter 8) bring up Scriptural passages of truths of Christian doctrine in order to raise problems that require a rational resolution. In other cases (as in De Concordia, Book 1 Chapter 5), he does use Scriptural passages as starting points for arguments, but for erroneous arguments that he then criticizes. In yet other cases, Anselm brings up Scripture precisely to explain how certain passages or expressions should be rightly understood (as in the De Casu Diaboli, explaining how God causing evil should be understood). Lastly, Anselm cites Scripture after the course of his argument in order to reconnect the rational argumentation with Christian revelation (as in Proslogion, Chapter 16, where Anselm’s previous reasoning culminates in God “inhabiting” an “inaccessible light”). For discussion of Anselm and Scripture, cf. Barth, 1960, Tonini, 1970, and Henry, 1962.

In his actual exercise of reason, Anselm displays both confidence in reason’s capacity for providing understanding to faith, and awareness of the limitations human reason’s exercise eventually runs into and becomes aware of. For instance, in Proslogion, Chapter 15, he concludes that God is not only that than which nothing greater can be thought, but something greater than can be thought. Another important aspect of Anselm’s fides quaerens intellectum is that, in the Monologion, reason is employed by one who “disputes and investigates with himself things he had not previously taken notice of [non animadvertisset],” (S., v. 1, p. 8) and in the Proslogion, one “striving to raise his mind to the contemplation of God, and seeking to understand what he believes.” (S., v. 1, p. 94)

Despite Anselm’s deliberate employment of reason as a means to the truth about both the natural and the supernatural order, his rationalism is a mitigated one. Monologion Chapter 1 exemplifies this. Anselm’s assessment is that one could persuade oneself of the truths argued for in the Monologion by the use of one’s reason, but Anselm hastens to add: “I wish it to be understood [accipi] that, even if a conclusion is reached [concludatur] seemingly as necessary [quasi necessarium] from reasons that seem good to me, it is not that it is entirely [omnino] necessary, but only that for the current time [interim] it be said to be able to appear necessary.” (S., v. 1, p.14)

Chapter 64 of the Monologion provides another important discussion of the use of reason and argument. Anselm distinguishes between being able to understand or explain that something is true or that something exists, and being able to understand or explain how something is true. Since the divine substance, the triune God is ultimately beyond the capacities of human understanding, reason, or more precisely the reasoning human subject, must recognize both the limits and the capacities of reason.

I think that for someone investigating an incomprehensible matter it ought to be sufficient, if by reasoning towards it, he arrives at knowing that it most certainly does exist, even if he is unable to go further by use of the intellect [penetrare. . . intellectu] into how it is this way. Nor for that reason should we withhold the certainty of faith from those things that are asserted through necessary proofs [probationibus], and that are inconsistent with no other reason, if because of the incomprehensibility of their natural sublimity they do not allow themselves [non patiuntur] to be explained. (S., v. 1, p. 75)

Anselm is not skeptically questioning or undermining the capacities of reason and argumentation. Not every possible object the intellect attempts to engage with presents such problems, but only God. Accordingly, although a completely full and exhaustively systematic account cannot be provided of the divine substance, this does not undermine the certainty of what reason has been able to determine.

Stylistically, Anselm’s treatises take two basic forms, dialogues and sustained meditations. The former represent pedagogical discussions between a fairly gifted and inquisitive pupil and a teacher. In the latter, Anselm provides, as noted earlier, models of meditation, but the model differs considerably from theMonologion to the Proslogion, for in the first treatise, Anselm aims to provide a model of a person meditating, or (using Aristotle’s conception) engaging in dialectic with himself, while in the second case, the person addresses himself to the very God that he is attempting to comprehend as best as human capacities allow.

In the dialogue Cur Deus Homo, a student, Boso, “my brother and most beloved son” (S., v. 2, p. 139) is called by name. In the majority of the dialogues, the student and teacher are not named; it is clear, however, that the teacher represents Anselm and presents Anselm’s doctrines. The De Conceptu Virginali and the De Concordia are not written in the same dialogue form as the other treatises, but they are dialogical in their narrative voice(s), since Anselm addresses himself to another person (in the De Conceptu Virginali to Boso), articulating possible problems and objections his reader might make in order to address them.

The dialogue form serves a pedagogical purpose and reflects the project of fides quaerens intellectum, exemplified well by this passage from the De Casu Diaboli: “[L]et it not weary you to briefly reply to my silly questioning [fatuae interrogationi], so that I might know how I should respond to someone asking me the very same thing. Indeed, it is not always easy to respond wisely [sapienter] to someone who is asking foolishly [insipienter].” (S., v. 1, p. 275)

Interestingly, it appears that a recurring problem for Anselm was his treatises being copied and circulated without his authorization and before their final and finished state. He asserts this to be the case with the three connected dialogues and the Cur Deus Homo.

The following sections provide discussions of, and excerpts from, many of Anselm’s key works. With the exception of the ProslogionMonologion, and Cur Deus Homo, the works are examined in chronological order (as best as we know it). These three works are discussed first and in this order because the Proslogion has garnered the most attention from philosophers (more than the earlierMonologion, with which it shares similar aims and content) and the Cur Deus Homo likewise has garnered more attention from theologians than the earlier three dialogues “pertaining to study of Sacred Scripture” (S., v.1, p. 173) (the De VeritateDe Libertate Arbitrii, and De Casu Diaboli).

4. The Proslogion

In the Proslogion, Anselm intended to replace the many interconnected arguments from his previous and much longer work, the Monologion, with a single argument. Since the unum argumentum is supposed to prove not only that God exists, but other matters about God as well, as noted above, there is some scholarly controversy as to exactly what the argument is in the Proslogion’s text. Clearly, the so-called “ontological argument” for God’s existence in Chapter 2 plays a central role. It must be pointed out that Anselm nowhere uses the term “ontological argument,” nor in fact do the critics or proponents of the argument until Kant’s time. It has unfortunately become so ingrained in our philosophical vocabulary, especially in Anglophone Anselm scholarship, however, that it would be pedantic to insist on not using it at all. An interesting and sizable recent literature has developed explicitly contesting the appellation “ontological” applied to Anselm’s Proslogion proof(s) of God’s being or existence, a partial bibliography of which is provided in McEvoy, 1994.

Noting that God is believed to be something than which nothing greater can be thought (quo maius cogitari non potest), Anselm asks whether such a thing exists, since the Fool of the Psalms has said in his heart that there is no God.

But certainly that very same Fool, when he hears this very expression I say [hoc ipsum quod dico]: “something than which nothing greater can be thought,” understands what he hears; and what he understands is in his understanding [in intellectu], even if he does not understand that thing to exist. For it is one thing to be in the understanding, and another to understand a thing to exist. . . . . Therefore even the fool is compelled to admit [convincitur] that there is in his understanding something than which nothing greater can be thought, since when he hears this he understands it, and whatever is understood is in the understanding. And certainly that than which a greater cannot be thought cannot exist in the understanding alone. For if it is in the intellect alone [in solo intellectu], it can be thought to also be in reality [in re], which is something greater. If, therefore, that than which a greater cannot be thought is in the intellect alone, that very thing than which a greater cannot be thought is that than which a greater can be thought. But surely that cannot be. Therefore, without a doubt, something than which a greater cannot be thought exists [exsistit] both in the understanding and in reality. (S., v. 1, p. 101-2)

In Chapter 3, Anselm continues the argumentation, providing what some commentators take to be a second ontological argument.

And, it so truly exists that it cannot be thought not to be. For, a thing, which cannot be thought not to be (which is greater than what cannot be thought not to be), can be thought to be. So, if that than which a greater cannot be thought can be thought not to be, that very thing than which a greater cannot be thought is not that than which a greater cannot be thought, which cannot be compatible [convenire, i.e. with the thing being such]. Therefore, there truly is something than which a greater cannot be thought, and it cannot be thought not to be. (S., p. 102-3)

Addressing himself to God, Anselm explains why God cannot be thought not to exist, indicating why God uniquely has this status. “[I]f some mind could think something better than you, the creature would ascend over the Creator, and would engage in judgment about the Creator, which is quite absurd. And anything else whatsoever other than yourself can be thought not to exist. For you alone are the most true of all things, and thus you have being to the greatest degree [maxime], for anything else is not so truly [as God], and for this reason has less of being.” (S., p. 103) This raises a puzzle, however. Why does the Fool not only doubt whether God exists, but assert that there is no God? One possible, but rather circular answer is provided at the end of Chapter 3. “Why else, except because he is stupid and a fool?” (S., p. 103) As Anselm knows, however, that does not really answer the question. Chapter 4 provides an answer. The Fool both does and does not think [cogitare] that God does not exist, since there are two senses of “think”:

A thing is thought of in one way when one thinks of the word [vox] signifying it, in another way when what the thing itself is is understood. Therefore, in the first way it can be thought that God does not exist, but in the second way not at all. Indeed no one who understands that which God is can think that God is not, even though he says these words in his heart, either without any signification or with some other signification not properly applying to God [aliqua extranea significatione]. (S., p. 103-104)

Proslogion Chapters 5-26 deal progressively with the divine attributes, 5-23 either continuing or building off of the argument, and 24-26 being connected conjectures about God’s goodness. In Chapter 5, Anselm deduces attributes of God from the same “than which nothing greater can be thought” he used in Chapters 2-4.

What then are you, Lord God, that than which nothing greater can be thought? But what are you if not that which is the greatest of all things, who alone exists through himself, who made everything else from nothing? For whatever is not this, is less than what can be thought. But this cannot be thought about you. For what good is lacking to the supreme good, through which every good thing is? And so, you are just, truthful, happy, and whatever it is better to be than not to be. (S., p. 104)

These attributes of God, what it is better to be than not to be, are filled out in Chapter 6 (percipient, omnipotent, merciful, impassible), Chapter 11 (living, wise, good, happy, eternal), and Chapter 18 (an unity).

In Chapter 18, Anselm argues from God’s superlative unity to the unity of his attributes. “[Y]ou are so much a kind of unity [unum quiddam] and identical to yourself, that you are dissimilar to yourself in no way; indeed, you are that very unity, divisible by no understanding. Therefore, life and wisdom and the other [attributes] are not parts of you but all of them are one, and each of them is entirely what you are, and what the other [attributes] are.” (S., p. 115)

In Chapter 23, he employs this notion of superlative unity to explain how God can be a Trinity, indicating that all of the persons of the Trinity share equally and completely in the divine attributes. In the divine unity, the second person of the Trinity, the Son, or the Word is coequal to the first person, “Truly, there cannot be anything other than what you are, or anything greater or lesser than you in the Word by which you speak yourself; for your Word is true [verum] in the same way that you are truthful [quomodo tu verax], and for that reason he is the very same truth as you, not other than you.” (S., p. 117) The same holds for the third person of the Trinity, which is “the one love, common to you and your Son, that is, the Holy Spirit who proceeds from both.” (S., p. 117) Accordingly, for each of the persons of the Trinity, “what any of them is individually is at the same time the entire Trinity, the Father and the Son and the Holy Spirit; for, any one of them individually is not something other than the supremely simple unity and the supremely one simplicity, which cannot be multiplied or be one thing different from another.” (S., p. 117)

There are five other main matters that Anselm addresses in the Proslogion, the first three of which are sets of problems stemming from seeming incompatibilities in the divine attributes. Anselm puts these questions in Chapter 6. “How can you be perceptive [es sensibilis] if you are not a body? How can you be omnipotent, if you cannot do everything? How can you be merciful and impassible at the same time?” (S., p. 104) Anselm deals with the first briefly in Chapter 6, proposing that perceiving is knowing (cognoscere) or aimed at knowing (ad cognoscendum), so that God is supremely perceptive without knowing things through the type of sensibility human beings and animals have.

The argumentation of Chapter 7 is particularly important. There are things that God cannot do, for instance lying, being corrupted, making what is true to be false or what has been done to not be done. It seems that a truly omnipotent being ought to be able to do these things. To be able to do such things, Anselm suggests, is not really to have a power (potentia), but really a kind of powerlessness (impotentia). “For one who can do these things, can do what is not advantageous to oneself and what one ought not do. The more a person can do these things, the more adversity and perversity can do against that person, and the less that person can do against these.” (S., p. 105) So, one who does these things does them through powerlessness, through having one’s agency subjected to that of something other, rather than through one’s power. This, as Anselm explains, relies on an inexact manner of speaking, where one expresses powerlessness or inability as a kind of power or ability

In Chapters 8-11, through a longer and more sustained argument, Anselm answers the third question explaining how God can be both merciful and just at the same time. The explanation rests on God’s mercy stemming from his goodness, which is not ultimately something different from God’s justice, and which can be reconciled with it. Anselm concludes in Chapter 12: “But certainly, whatever you are, you are not through another but through yourself. Accordingly, you are the very life by which you live, and the wisdom by which you are wise, and the goodness by which you are good to good people and bad people; and likewise with similar attributes.” (S., p. 110) For God to be merciful to, forgive, and therefore not render justice to all transgressors, or likewise for God to not extend mercy, forgive, and therefore render justice to all transgressors would be for God to be something lesser than He is. It is, in effect, greater to be able to be just and merciful at the same time, which is possible for God precisely because justice and goodness coincide only in God. At the same time, Anselm concedes that when it comes to understanding precisely why God mercifully forgives of justly rendered judgment in a particular case is beyond our human capacities. For further discussion of Chapters 8-11, cf. Bayart, 1937, Corbin, 1988, and Sadler, 2006.

The fourth main issue, discussed in Chapters 14-17, has to do with our limited knowledge of God, which stems both from human sinfulness and God’s dazzling splendor. Again, as in Chapter 4, one can say that something is and is not the case at the same time, because it is being said in different and distinguishable ways. “If [my soul] did not see you [God], then it did not see the light or the truth. But, is not the truth and the light what it saw and yet did it still not yet see you, since it saw you only in a certain way [aliquatenus] but did not see you exactly as you are [sicuti es]?” (S., p. 111)

The reason the human soul does not see God directly is twofold, stemming both from finite human nature and from infinite divine nature. “But certainly [the human mind] is darkened in itself, and it is dazzled [reverbetur] by you. It is obscured by its own shortness of view [sua brevitate], and it is overwhelmed by your immensity. Truly it is restricted [contrahitur] in by its own narrowness, and it is overcome [vincitur] by your grandeur.” (S., p. 112) For this reason, in Chapter 15, Anselm concludes that God is in fact “greater than can be thought” (maior quam cogitari potest).

Finally, in Chapters 18-21, Anselm discusses God’s eternity. Anselm first indicates that God’s eternity is such that God is entirely present whenever and wherever God is, which is to say everywhere and at all times. Then, in Chapter 19, he begins to articulate the implications of God’s eternity more fully, ultimately leading into a transformation of perspective. Just as it is not the case that there is eternity and God happens to be in and is therefore eternal, since the reality is that God is eternity itself, God is not in every time or place, but rather everything, all times and places, is in God, that is, in God’s eternity.

5. Gaunilo’s Reply and Anselm’s Response

Gaunilo, a monk from the Abbey of Marmoutier, while noting the value of the remainder of theProslogion, attacked its argument for God’s existence on several counts. His arguments prefigure many arguments made by later philosophers against ontological arguments for God’s existence, and Anselm’s responses provide additional insight into the Proslogion argument. Gaunilo makes four main objections, and in each case, Gaunilo transposes Anselm’s “that than which nothing greater can be thought” into “that which is greater than everything else that can be thought.”

Gaunilo asserts that an additional argument is needed to move from this being having been thought to it being impossible for it not to be. “It needs to be proven to me by some other undoubtable argument that this being is of such a sort that as soon as it is thought its undoubtable existence is perceived with certainty by the understanding.” (S., v. 1, p. 126) He brings up this need for a further, unsupplied, argument twice more in his Reply, and in the last instance discusses what is really at issue. The Fool can say: “[W]hen did I say that in the truth of the matter [rei veritate] there was such a thing that is ‘greater than everything?’ For first, by some other completely certain argument, some superior nature must be proven to exist, that is, one greater or better than everything that exists, so that from this we could prove all the other things that cannot be lacking to what is greater or better than everything else.” (S., p. 129)

A second problem is whether one can actually understand what is supposed to be understood in order for the argument to work because God is unlike any creature, anything that we have knowledge or a conception of . “When I hear ‘that which is greater than everything that can be thought,’ which cannot be said to be anything other than God himself, I cannot think it or have it in the intellect on the basis of something I know from its species or genus. . . . For I neither know the thing itself, nor can I form an idea of it from something similar.” (S., p. 126-7)

Gaunilo continues along this line, arguing that the verbal formula employed in the argument is merely that, a verbal formula. The formula cannot really be understood, so it does not then really exist in the understanding. The signification or meaning of the terms can be thought, “but not as by a person who knows what is typically signified by this expression [voce], i.e. by one who thinks it on the basis of a thing that is true at least in thought alone.” (S., p. 127) Instead, what is actually being thought, according to Gaunilo, is vague. The signification or meaning of the terms is grasped only in a groping manner. “[I]t is thought as by one who does not know the thing and simply thinks on the basis of a movement of the mind produced by hearing this expression, trying to picture to himself the meaning of the expression perceived.” (S., p. 127) From this, Gaunilo concludes what he takes to be a denial of one of the premises of the argument: “So much then for the notion that that supreme nature is said to already exist in my understanding.” (S., p. 127)

A third problem that Gaunilo raises is that the argument could be applied to things other than God, things that are clearly imaginary, so that, if the argument were valid, it could be used to prove much more than Anselm intended, namely falsities. Here, the example of the Lost Island is introduced. “You can no longer doubt that this island excelling [praestantiorem] all other lands truly exists somewhere in reality, this island that you do not doubt to exist in your understanding; and since it is more excellent not to be in the understanding alone but also to be in reality, so it is necessary that it exists, since, if it did not, any other land that exists in reality would be more excellent than it.” (S., p. 128)

Anselm’s responses are long, detailed, and dense. Anselm notes Gaunillo’s alteration of the terms of the argument, and that this affects the force of the argument.

You repeat often that I say that, because what is greater than everything else [maius omnibus] is in the understanding, if it is the understanding it is in reality – for otherwise what is greater than everything else would not be greater than everything else – but such a proof [probatio] is found nowhere in all of the things I have said. For, saying “that which is greater than all” and “that than which nothing greater can be thought” do not have the same value for proving that what is being talked about is in reality. (S., p. 134)Therefore if, from what is said to be “greater than everything,” what “that than which nothing greater can be thought” proves of itself through itself [de se per seipsum] cannot be proved in a similar way, you have unjustly criticized me for having said what I did not say, when this differs so much from what I did say. (S., p. 135)

In Anselm’s view, Gaunilo demands a further argument precisely because he has not understood the argument as Anselm presented it. Anselm also affirms that we can understand the meaning of the term, “that than which nothing greater can be thought,” and that it is not simply a verbal formula.

Again, that you say that, when you hear it, you are not able to think or have in your mind “that than which a greater cannot be thought” on the basis of something known from its species or genus, so that you neither know the thing itself, nor can you form an idea of it from something similar. But quite evidently the matter is and remains otherwise [aliter sese habere]. For, every lesser good, insofar as it is good, is similar to a greater good. It is apparent to any reasonable mind that by ascending from lesser goods to greater ones, from those than which something greater can be thought, we are able to infer much [multum. . .conjicere] about that than which nothing greater can be thought. (S., p. 138)

Anselm notes a similarity between the terms “ineffable,” “unthinkable,” and “that than which nothing greater can be thought,” for in each case, it can be impossible for us to think or understand the thing referred to by the expression, but the expression can be thought and understood. Earlier on, Anselm makes a distinction that sheds additional light on this distinction between thinking and understanding the expression, and thinking and understanding the thing referred to by the expression. He also employs a useful metaphor. “[I]f you say that what is not entirely understood is not understood and is not in the understanding: say, then, that since someone is not able to gaze upon the purest light of the sun does not see light that is nothing but sunlight.” (S., p. 132) We do not have to fully and exhaustively understand what a term refers to in order for us to understand the term, and that applies to this case. “Certainly ‘that than which a greater cannot be thought’ is understood and is in the understanding at least to the extent [hactenus] that these things are understood of it.” (S., p. 132)

Anselm also clarifies the scope of his argument, indicating that it applies only to God: “I say confidently that if someone should find for me something existing either in reality or solely in thought, besides ‘that than which a greater cannot be thought,’ to which the schematic framework [conexionem] of my argument could rightly be adapted [aptare valeat], I will find and give him this lost island, nevermore to be lost.” (S., p. 134)

6. The Monologion

This earlier and considerably longer work includes an argument for God’s existence, but also much more discussion of the divine attributes and economy, and some discussion of the human mind. The proof Anselm provides in Chapter 1 is one he considers easiest for a person

who, either because of not hearing or because of not believing, does not know of the one nature, greatest of all things that are, alone sufficient to itself in its eternal beatitude, and who by his omnipotent goodness gives to and makes for all other things that they are something or that in some way they are well [aliquomodo bene sunt], and of the great many other things that we necessarily believe about God or about what he has created. (S., v. 1, p. 13)

The Monologion proof argues from the existence of many good things to a unity of goodness, a one thing through which all other things are good. Anselm first asks whether the diversity of good we experience through our senses and through our mind’s reasoning are all good through one single good thing, or whether there are different and multiple good things through which they are good. He recognizes, of course, that there are a variety of ways for things to be good things, and he also recognizes that many things are in fact good through other things. But, he is pushing the question further, since for every good thing B through which another good thing A is good, one can still ask what that good thing B is good through. If goods can even be comparable as goods, there must be some more general and unified way of regarding their goodness, or that through which they are good. Anselm argues: “you are not accustomed to considering something good except on an account of some usefulness, as health and those things that conduce to health are said to be good [propter aliquam utilitatem], or because of being of intrinsic value in some way [propter quamlibet honestatem], just as beauty and things that contribute to beauty are esteemed to be a good.” (S., p. 14)

This being granted, usefulness and intrinsic values can be brought to a more general unity. “It is necessary, for all useful or intrinsically valuable things, if they are indeed good things, that they are good through this very thing, through which all goods altogether [cuncta bona] must exist, whatever this thing might be.” (S., p. 14-5) This good alone is good through itself. All other good things are ultimately good through this thing, which is the superlative or supreme good. Certain corollaries can be drawn from this. One is that all good things are not only good through this Supreme Good; they are good, that is to say they have their being from the Supreme Good. Another is that “what is supremely good [summe bonum] is also supremely great [summe magnum]. Accordingly, there is one thing that is supremely good and supremely great, i.e. the highest [summum] of all things that are.” (S., p. 15) In Chapter 2, Anselm clarifies what he means by “great,” making a point that will assume greater importance in Chapter 15: “But, I am speaking about ‘great’ not with respect to physical space [spatio], as if it is some body, but rather about things that are greater [maius] to the degree that they are better [melius] or more worthy [dignus], for instance wisdom.” (S., p. 15)

Chapter 3 provides further discussion of the ontological dependence of all beings on this being. For any thing that is or exists, there must be something through which it is or exists. “For, everything that is, either is through [per] something or through nothing. But nothing is through nothing. For, it cannot be thought [non. . .cogitari potest] that something should be but not through something. So, whatever is, only is through something.” (S., p. 15-6) Anselm considers and rejects several possible ways of explaining how it is that all things are. There could be one single being through which all things have their being. Or there could be a plurality of beings through which other beings have their being. The second possibility allows three cases: “[I]f they are multiple, then either: 1) they are referred to some single thing through which they are, or 2) they are, individually [singula], through themselves [per se], or 3) they are mutually through each other [per se invicem].” (S., p. 16)

In the first case, they are all through one single being. In the second case, there is still some single power or nature of existing through oneself [existendi per se], common to all of them. Saying that they exist through themselves really means that they exist through this power or nature which they share. Again, they have one single ontological ground upon which they are dependent. One can propose the third case, but it is upon closer consideration absurd. “Reason does not allow that there would be many things [that have their being] mutually through each other, since it is an irrational thought that some thing should be through another thing, to which the first thing gives its being.” (S., p. 16)

For Anselm three things follow from this. First, there is a single being through which all other beings have their being. Second, this being must have its being through itself. Third, in the gradations of being, this being is to the greatest degree.

Whatever is through something else is less than that through which everything else together is, and that which alone is through itself. . . . So, there is one thing that alone, of all things, is, to the greatest degree and supremely [maxime et summe]. For, what of all things is to the greatest degree, and through which anything else is good or great, and through which anything else is something, necessarily that thing is supremely good and supremely great and the highest of all things that are. (S., p. 16)

Chapter 4 continues this discussion of degrees. In the nature of things, there are varying degrees (gradus) of dignity or worth (dignitas). The example Anselm uses is humorous and indicates an important feature of the human rational mind, namely its capacity to grasp these different degrees of worth. “For, one who doubts whether a horse in its nature is better than a piece of wood, and that a human being is superior to a horse, that person assuredly does not deserve to be called a human being.” (S., p. 17) Anselm argues that there must be a highest nature, or rather a nature that does not have a superior, otherwise the gradations would be infinite and unbounded, which he considers absurd. By argumentation similar to that of the previous chapters, he adduces that there can only be one such highest nature. The scale of gradations comes up again later in Chapter 31, where he indicates that creatures’ degrees of being, and being superior to other creatures, depends on their degree of likeness to God (specifically to the divine Word).

[E]very understanding judges natures in any way living to be superior to non-living ones, sentient natures to be superior to non-sentient ones, rational ones to be superior to irrational ones. For since the Supreme Nature, in its own unique manner, not only is but also lives and perceives and is rational, it is clear that. . . what in any way is living is more alike to the Supreme Nature than that which does not in any way live; and, what in any way, even by bodily sense, knows something is more like the Supreme Nature than what does not perceive at all; and, what is rational is more like the Supreme Nature than what is not capable of reason. (S., p. 49)

Through something akin to what analytic philosophers might term a thought-experiment and phenomenologists an eidetic variation, Anselm considers a being gradually stripped of reason, sentience, life, and then the “bare being” (nudum esse) that would be left: “[T]his substance would be in this way bit by bit destroyed, led by degrees (gradatim) to less and less being, and finally to non-being. And, those things that, when they are taken away [absumpta] one by one from some essence, reduce it to less and less being, when they are reassumed [assumpta] . . . lead it to greater and greater being.” (S., p. 49-50)

In the chapters that follow, Anselm indicates that the Supreme Nature derives its existence only from itself, meaning that it was never brought into existence by something else. Anselm uses an analogy to suggest how the being of the Supreme Being can be understood.

Therefore in what way it should be understood [intelligenda est] to be through itself and from itself [per se et ex se], if it does not make itself, not arise as its own matter, nor in any way help itself to be what it was not before?. . . .In the way “light” [lux] and “to light” [lucere] and “lighting” [lucens] are related to each other [sese habent ad invicem], so are “essence” [essentia] and “to be” [esse] and “being,” i.e. supremely existing or supremely subsisting. (S., p. 20)

This Supreme Nature is that through which all things have their being precisely because it is the Creator, which creates all beings (including the matter of created beings) ex nihilo.

In Chapters 8-14, the argument shifts direction, leading ultimately to a restatement of the traditional Christian doctrine of the Logos (the “Word” of God, the Son of the Father and Creator). The argumentation starts by examination of the meaning of “nothing,” distinguishing different senses and uses of the term. Creation ex nihilo could be interpreted three different ways. According to the first way, “what is said to have been made from nothing has not been made at all.” (S., p. 23) In another way, “something was said to be made from nothing in this way, that it was made from this very nothing, that is from that which is not; as if this nothing were something existing, from which something could be made.” (S., p. 23) Finally, there is a “third interpretation. . . when we understand something to be made but that there is not something from which it has been made.” (S., p. 23)

The first way, Anselm says, cannot be properly applied to anything that actually has been made, and the second way is simply false, so the third way or sense is the correct interpretation. In Chapter 9, an important implication of creation ex nihilo is drawn out “There is no way that something could come to be rationally from another, unless something preceded the thing to be made in the maker’s reason as a model, or to put it better a form, or a likeness, or a rule.” (S., p. 24) This, in turn implies another important doctrine: “what things were going to be, or what kinds of things or how the things would be, were in the supreme nature’s reason before everything came to be.” (S., p. 24) In subsequent chapters, the doctrine is further elaborated, culminating in this pattern being the utterance (locutio) of the supreme essence and the supreme essence, that is to say the Word (verbum) of the Father, while being of the same substance as the Father.

Chapter 15-28 examine, discuss, and argue for particular attributes of God, 15-17 and 28 being of particular interest. Chapter 15 is devoted to the matter of what can be said about the divine substance. Relative terms do not really communicate the essence of the divine being, even including expressions such as “the highest of all” (summa omnium) or “greater than everything that has been created by it” (maior omnibus . . .) “For if none of those things ever existed, in relation to which [God] is called “the highest” and “greater,” it would be understood to be neither the highest nor greater. But still, it would be no less good on that account, nor would it suffer any loss of the greatness of its essence. And this is obvious, for this reason: whatever may be good or great, this thing is not such through another but by its very self.” (S., p. 28)

There are still other ways of talking about the divine substance. One way is to say that the divine substance is “whatever is in general [omnino] better that what is not it. For, it alone is that than which nothing is better, and that which is better than everything else that is not what it is.” (S., p. 29) Given that explanation, while there are some things that it is better for certain beings to be rather than not to be, God will not be those things, but only what it is absolutely better to be than not to be. So, for instance, God will not be a body, but God will be wise or just. Anselm provides a partial listing of the qualities or attributes that do express the divine essence: “living, wise, powerful and all-powerful, true, just, happy, eternal, and whatever in like wise it is absolutely better to be than not to be.” (S., p. 29)

Anselm raises a problem in Chapter 16. Granted that God has these attributes, one might think that all that is being signified is that God is a being that has these attributes to a greater degree than other beings, not what God is. Anselm uses justice as the example, which is fitting since it is usually conceived of as something relational. Anselm first sets out the problem in terms of participation in qualities. “[E]verything that is just is just through justice, and similarly for other things of this sort. Accordingly, that very supreme nature is not just unless through justice. So, it appears that by participation in the quality, namely justice, the supremely good substance can be called just.” (S., p. 30) And this reasoning leads to the conclusion that the supremely good substance “is just through another, and not through itself.” (S., p. 30)

The problem is that God is what he is through himself, while other things are what they are through him. In the case of each divine attribute, as in the later Proslogion, God having that attribute is precisely that attribute itself, so that for instance, God is not just by some standard or idea of justice extrinsic to God himself, but rather God is God’s own justice, and justice in the superlative sense. Everything else canhave the attribute of justice, whereas God is justice. This argument can be extended to all of God’s attributes What is perceived to have been settled in the case of justice, the intellect is constrained by reason to judge [sentire] to be the case about everything that is said in a similar way about that supreme nature. Whichever of them, then, is said about the supreme nature, it is not how [qualis] nor how much [quanta] [the supreme nature has quality] that is shown [monstratur] but rather what it is. . . .Thus, it is the supreme essence, supreme life, supreme reason, supreme salvation [salus], supreme justice, supreme wisdom, supreme truth, supreme goodness, supreme greatness, supreme beauty, supreme immortality, supreme incorruptibility, supreme immutability, supreme happiness, supreme eternity, supreme power [potestas], supreme unity, which is nothing other than supreme being, supremely living, and other things in like wise [similiter]. (S., p. 30-1)

This immediately raises yet another problem, however, because this seems like a multiplicity of supreme attributes, implying that each is a particularly superlative way of being for God, suggesting that God is in some manner a composite. Instead, in God (not in any other being) each of these is all of the others. God’s being alone, as Chapter 28 argues, is being in an unqualified sense. All other beings, since they are mutable, or because they can be understood to have come from non-being, “barely (vix) exist or almost (fere) do not exist.” (S., p. 46)

Chapters 29-48 continue the investigation of the generation of the “utterance” or Word, the Son, from the Father in the divine economy, and 49-63 expand this to discussion of the love between the Father and the Son, namely the Holy Spirit, equally God as the Father and Son. 64-80 discuss the human creature’s grasp and understanding of God. Chapter 31 is of particular interest, and discusses the relationship between words or thoughts in human minds and the Word or Son by which all things were created by the Father. A human mind contains images or likenesses of things that are thought of or talked about, and a likeness is true to the degree that it imitates more or less the thing of which it is likeness, so that the thing has a priority in truth and in being over the human subject apprehending it, or more properly speaking, over the image, idea, or likeness by which the human subject apprehends the thing. In the Word, however, there are not likenesses or images of the created things, but instead, the created things are themselves imitations of their true essences in the Word.

The discussion in Chapters 64-80, which concludes the Monologion, makes three central points. First, the triune God is ineffable, and except in certain respects incomprehensible, but we can arrive at this conclusion and understand it to some degree through reason. This is because our arguments and investigations do not attain the distinctive character (proprietatem) of God. That does not present an insurmountable problem, however.

For often we talk about many things that we do not express properly, exactly as they really are, but we signify through another thing what we will not or can not bring forth properly, as for instance when we speak in riddles. And often we see something, not properly, exactly how the thing is, but through some likeness or image, for instance when we look upon somebody’s face in a mirror. Indeed, in this way we talk about and do not talk about, see and do not see, the same thing. We talk about it and see it through something else; we do not talk about it and see it through its distinctive character [proprietatem]Now, whatever names seem to be able to be said of this nature, they do not so much reveal it to me through its distinctive character as signify it [innuunt] to me through some likeness. (S., v. 1, p. 76)

Anselm uses the example of the divine attribute of wisdom. “For the name ‘wisdom’ is not sufficient to reveal to me that being through which all things were made from nothing and preserved from [falling into] nothing.” (S., p. 76)

The outcome of this is that all human thought and knowledge about God is mediated through something. Likenesses are never the thing of which they are a likeness, but there are greater and lesser degrees of likeness. This leads to the second point. Human beings come closer to knowing God through investigating what is closer to him, namely the rational mind, which is a mirror both of itself and, albeit in a diminished way, of God.

[J]ust as the rational mind alone among all other creatures is able to rise to the investigation of this Being, likewise it is no less alone that through which the rational mind itself can make progress towards investigation of that Being. For we have already come to know [jam cognitum est] that the rational mind, through the likeness of natural essence, most approaches that Being. What then is more evident than that the more assiduously the rational mind directs itself to learning about itself, the more effectively it ascends to the knowledge [cognitionem] of that Being, and that the more carelessly it looks upon itself, the more it descends from the exploration [speculatione] of that Being? (S., v. 1, p. 77)

Third, to be truly rational involves loving and seeking God, which in fact requires an effort to remember and understand God. “[I]t is clear that the rational creature ought to expend all of its capacity and willing [suum posse et velle] on remembering and understanding and loving the Supreme Good, for which purpose it knows itself to have its own being.” (S., p. 79)

7. Cur Deus Homo

The Monologion and Proslogion (although often only Chapters 2-4 of the latter) are typically studied by philosophers. The Cur Deus Homo (Why God Became Man) is more frequently studied by theologians, particularly since Anselm’s interpretation of the Atonement has been influential in Christian theology. The method, however, as in his other works, is primarily a philosophical one, attempting to understand truths of the Christian faith through the use of reasoning, granted of course, that this reasoning is applied to theological concepts. Anselm provides a twofold justification for the treatise, both responding to requests “by speech and by letter.” The first is for those asking Anselm to discuss the Incarnation, providing rational accounts (rationes) “not so that through reason they attain to faith, but so that they may delight in the understanding and contemplation of those things they believe, and so that they might be, as much as possible, 'always ready to satisfy all those asking with an account [rationem] for those things for which' we 'hope.'” (S., v. 2, p. 48)

The second is for those same people, but so that they can engage in argument with non-Christians. As Anselm says, non-believers make the question of the Incarnation a crux in their arguments against Christianity, “ridiculing Christian simplicity as foolishness, and many faithful are accustomed to turn it over in their hearts.” (S., p. 48) The question simply stated is this: “by what reason or necessity was God made man, and by his death, as we believe and confess, gave back life to the world, when he could have done this either through another person, either human or angelic, or through his will alone?” (S., p. 48)

In Chapter 3, Anselm’s interlocutor, his fellow monk and student Boso, raises several specific objections made by non-Christians to the Christian doctrine of the Incarnation: “we do injustice and show contempt [contumeliam] to God when we affirm that he descended into a woman’s womb, and that he was born of woman, that he grew nourished by milk and human food, and – so that I can pass over many other things that do not seem befitting to God– that he endured weariness, hunger, thirst, lashes, and the cross and death between thieves.” (S., v. 2, p. 51)

Anselm’s immediate response mirrors the structure of the Cur Deus Homo. Each of the points he makes are argued in fuller detail later in the work.

For it was fitting that, just as death entered into the human race by man’s disobedience, so should life be restored by man’s obedience. And, that, just as the sin that was the cause of our damnation had its beginning from woman, so the author of our justice and salvation should be born from woman. And, that the devil conquered man through persuading him to taste from the tree [ligni], should be conquered by man through the passion he endured on the tree [ligni]. (S., p. 51)

The first book (Chapters 1-25), produces a lengthy argument, involving a number of distinctions, discussions about the propriety of certain expressions and the entailments of willing certain things. Chapters 16-19 represent a lengthy digression involving questions about the number of angels who fell or rebelled against God, whether their number is to be made up of good humans, and related questions. The three most important parts of the argument take the form of these discussions: the justice and injustice of God, humans, and the devil; the entailments of the Father and the Son willing the redemption of humanity; the inability of humans to repay God for their sins.

Anselm distinguishes, as he does in the earlier treatise De Veritate, different ways in which an action or state can be just or unjust, specifically just and unjust at the same time, but not in the same way of looking at the matter. “For, it happens sometimes [contingit] that the same thing is just and unjust considered from different viewpoints [diversis considerationibus], and for this reason it is adjudged to be entirely just or entirely unjust by those who do not look at it carefully.” (S., p. 57) Humans are justly punished by God for sin, and they are justly tormented by the devil, but the devil unjustly torments humans, even though it is just for God to allow this to take place.“In this way, the devil is said to torment a man justly, because God justly permits this and the man justly suffers it. But, because a man is said to justly suffer, one does not mean that he justly suffers because of his own justice, but because he is punished by God’s just judgment.” (S., p. 57)

Not only distinguishing between different ways of looking at the same matter is needed, but also distinguishing between what is directly willed and what is entailed in willing certain things. On first glance, it could seem that God the Father directly wills the death of Jesus Christ, God the Son, or that the latter wills his own death. Indeed something like this has to be the case, because God does will the redemption of humanity, and this comes through the Incarnation and through Christ’s death and resurrection. According to Anselm, Christ dies as an entailment of what it is that God wills. “For, if we intend to do something, but propose to do something else first through which the other thing will be done, when what we chose to be first is done, if what we intend comes to be, it is correctly said to be done on account of the other…” (S., p. 62-3) Accordingly, what God willed (as both Father and Son) was the redemption of the human race, which required the death of Christ, and required this “not because the Father preferred the death of the Son over his life, but because the Father was not willing to restore the human race unless man did something as great as that death of Christ was.” (S., p. 63) As Anselm goes on to explain, the determination of the Son’s will then takes place within the structure of the Father’s will. “Since reason did not demand that another person do what he could not, for that reason the Son says that he wills his own death, which he preferred to suffer rather than that the human race not be saved.” (S., p. 63-4) What was involved in Christ’s death, therefore, was actually obedience on the part of the Son, following out precisely what was entailed by God’s willing to redeem humanity. The central point of the argument is then making clear why the redemption of humanity would have to involve the death of Christ. Articulating this, Anselm begins by discussing sin in terms of what is due or owed to (quod debet) God.

Sin is precisely not giving God what is due to him, namely: “[e]very willing [voluntas] of a rational creature should [debet] be subject to God’s will.” (S., p. 68) Doing this is justice or rightness of will, and is the “sole and complete debt of honor” (solus et totus honor), which is owed to God. Now, sin, understood as disobedience and contempt or dishonor, is not as simple, nor as simple to remedy, as it first appears. In the sinful act or volition, which already requires its own compensation, there is an added sin against God’s honor, which requires additional compensation. “But, so long as he does not pay for [solvit] what he has wrongly taken [rapuit], he remains in fault. Nor does it suffice simply to give back what was taken away, but for the contempt shown [pro contumelia illata] he ought to give back more than he took away.” (S., p. 68)

Anselm provides analogous examples: one endangering another’s safety ought to restore the safety, but also compensate for the anguish (illata doloris iniuria recompenset); violating somebody’s honor requires not only honoring the person again, but also making recompense in some other way; unjust gains should be recompensed not only by returning the unjust gain, but also by something that could not have otherwise been demanded.

The question then is whether it would be right for God to simply forgive humans sins out of mercy (misericordia), and the answer is that this would be unbefitting to God, precisely because it would contravene justice. It is really impossible, however, for humans to make recompense or satisfaction, that is to say, satisfy the demands of justice, for their sins. One reason for this is that one already owes whatever one would give God at any given moment. Boso suggests numerous possible recompenses: “[p]enitence, a contrite and humbled heart, abstinence and bodily labors of many kinds, and mercy in giving and forgiving, and obedience.” (S., p. 68)

Anselm responds, however: “When you give to God something that you owe him, even if you do not sin, you ought not reckon this as the debt that you own him for sin. For, you owe all of these things you mention to God.” (S., p. 68) Strict justice requires that a human being make satisfaction for sin, satisfaction that is humanly impossible. Absent this satisfaction, God forgiving the sin would violate strict justice, in the process contravening the supreme justice that is God. A human being is doubly bound by the guilt of sin, and is therefore “inexcusable” having “freely [sponte] obligated himself by that debt that he cannot pay off, and by his fault cast himself down into this impotency, so that neither can he pay back what he owed before sinning, namely not sinning, nor can he pay back what he owes because he sinned.” (S., p. 92)

Accordingly, humans must be redeemed through Jesus Christ, who is both man and God, the argument for which comes in Book II, starting in Chapter 6, and elaborated through the remainder of the treatise, which also treats subsidiary problems. The argument at its core is that only a human being can make recompense for human sin against God, but this being impossible for any human being, such recompense could only be made by God. This is only possible for Jesus Christ, the Son, who is both God and man, with (following the Chalcedonian doctrine) two natures united but distinct in the same person (Chapter7). The atonement is brought about by Christ’s death, which is of infinite value, greater than all created being (Chapter 14), and even redeems the sins of those who killed Christ (Chapter 15). Ultimately, in Anselm’s interpretation of the atonement, divine justice and divine mercy in the fullest senses are shown to be entirely compatible.

8. De Grammatico

This dialogue stands on its own in the Anselmian corpus, and focuses on untangling some puzzles about language, qualities, and substances. Anselm’s solutions to the puzzles involve making needed distinctions at proper points, and making explicit what particular expressions are meant to express. The dialogue ends with the puzzles resolved, but also with Anselm signaling the provisional status of the conclusions reached in the course of investigation. He cautions the student: “Since I know how much the dialecticians in our times dispute about the question you brought forth, I do not want you to stick to the points we made so that you would hold them obstinately if someone were to be able to destroy them by more powerful arguments and set up others.” (S., v. 1, p.168)

The student begins by asking whether “expert in grammar” (grammaticus) is a substance or a quality. The question, and the discussion, has a wider scope, however, since once that is known, “I will recognize what I ought to think about other things that are similarly spoken of through derivation [denominative].” (S., p.144)

There is a puzzle about the term “expert in grammar,” and other like terms, because a case, or rather an argument, can be made for either option, meaning it can be construed to be a substance or a quality. The student brings forth the argument.

That every expert in grammar is a man, and that every man is a substance, suffice to prove that expert in grammar is a substance. For, whatever the expert in grammar has that substance would follow from, he has only from the fact that he is a man. So, once it is conceded that he is a man, whatever follows from being a man follows from being an expert in grammar. (S., v. 1, p.144-5)

At the same time, philosophers who have dealt with the subject have maintained that it is a quality, and their authority is not to be lightly disregarded. So, there is a serious and genuine problem. The term must signify either a substance or a quality, and cannot do both. One option must be true and the other false, but since there are arguments to be made for either side, it is difficult to tell which one is false.

The teacher responds by pointing out that the options are not necessarily incompatible with each other. Before explaining how this can be so, he asks the student to lay out the objections against both options. The student begins by attacking the premise “expert in grammar is a man” (grammaticum esse hominem) with two arguments

No expert in grammar can be understood [intelligi] without reference to grammar, and every man can be understood without reference to grammar.Every expert in grammar admits of [being] more and less, and No man admits of [being] more or less From either one of these linkings [contextione] of two propositions one conclusion follows, i.e. no expert in grammar is a man. (S., p.146)

The teacher states, however, that this conclusion does not follow from the premises, and uses a similar argument to illustrate his point. The term “animal” signifies “animate substance capable of perception,” which can be understood without reference to rationality. The teacher then gets the student to admit to a further proposition, “every animal can be understood without reference to rationality, and no animal is from necessity rational,” to which he adds: “But no man can be understood without reference to rationality, and it is necessary that every man be rational.” (S., p.147) The implication, which the student sees and would like to avoid, is the clearly false conclusion, “no man is an animal.” On the other hand, the student does not want to give up the connection between man and rationality.

The teacher indicates a way out of the predicament by noting that the false conclusions are arrived at by inferring from the premises in a mechanical way, without examining what is in fact being expressed by the premises, without making proper distinctions based on what is being expressed, and without restating the premises as propositions more adequately expressing what the premises are supposed to assert. The teacher begins by asking the student to make explicit what the man, and the expert in grammar, are being understood as with or without reference to grammar. This allows the premises in the student’s arguments to be more adequately restated.

Every man can be understood as man without reference to grammar. No expert in grammar can be understood as expert in grammar without reference to grammar.No man is more or less man, and Every expert in grammar is more or less an expert in grammar. (S., v. 1, p.148-9)

In both cases, it is now apparent that where it seemed previously there was a common term, and therefore a valid syllogism, there is in fact no common term. This does not mean that nothing can be validly inferred from them. But, in order for something to be validly inferred, a common term must be found. The teacher advises: “The common term of a syllogism should be not so much in the expression brought forward [in prolatione] as in meaning [in sententia].” (S., p.149) The reasoning behind this is that what “binds the syllogism together” is the meaning of the terms used, not the mere words, “For just as nothing is accomplished if the term is common in language [in voce] but not in meaning [in sensu], likewise nothing impedes us if it is in our understanding [in intellectu] but not in the expression brought forward [in prolatione].” (S., p.149)

The first set of premises of the of the student’s double argument can be reformulated then as the following new premises.

To be a man does not require grammar, and
To be an expert in grammar requires grammar. (S., p.149)

Thus restated, the premises do have a common term, and a conclusion can be inferred from them namely: “To be an expert in grammar is not to be a man, i.e., there is not the same definition for both of them.” (S., p.149) What this conclusion means is not that an expert in grammar is not a man, but rather that they are not identical, they do not have the same definition. Other syllogisms, appearing at first glance valid but terminating in false conclusions, can similarly be transformed. One that deals directly with the student’s initial question runs:

Every expert in grammar is spoken of as a quality [in eo quod quale].
No man is spoken of as a quality.
Thus, no man is an expert in grammar. (S., p.150)

The premises can be reformulated according to their meaning:

Every expert in grammar is spoken of as expert in grammar as a quality.
No man is spoken of as man as a quality. (S., p.150)

It is now apparent that again there is no middle term, and the conclusion does not validly follow. The student explores various possible syllogisms that might be constructed before the teacher indicates that the student, who ends with the conclusion, “the essence of man is not the essence of expert in grammar,” (S., p.150) has not fully grasped the lesson. The teacher brings in a further distinction, that of respect or manner (modo). This requires attention to what is actually being signified by the expressions “man,” and “expert in grammar.” An expert in grammar, who is a man, can be understood as a man without reference to grammar, so in some respect an expert in grammar can be understood without reference to grammar (that is, understood as man, not as an expert in grammar, which he nonetheless still is). And, a man, who is an expert in grammar, who is to be understood as an expert in grammar, cannot be so understood without reference to grammar.

Another puzzle can be raised about man and expert in grammar, bearing on being present in a subject. An argument clearly going against Aristotle’s intentions can be derived by using one of his statements as a premise.

Expert in grammar is among those things that are in a subject.
And, no man is in a subject.
So, no expert in grammar is a man. (S., p.154)

The teacher again directs the student to pay close attention to the meaning of what is being said. When one speaks about an “expert in grammar,” the things that are signified are “man” and “grammar.” Man is a substance, and is not present in a subject, but grammar is a quality and is present in a subject. So, depending on what way one looks at it, someone can say that expert in grammar is a substance and is not in a subject, if they mean “expert in grammar” insofar as the expert in grammar is a man (secundum hominem). Alternately, one can say that expert in grammar is a quality and is in a subject, if they mean “expert in grammar” with respect to grammar (secundum grammaticam). Similarly, “expert in grammar” can be regarded, from different points of view, as being primary or secondary substance, or as neither.

“Expert in grammar” has been shown to be able to be both a substance and a quality, so that there is no inconsistency between them. The student then raises a related problem, asking why “man” cannot similarly be a substance and a quality. “For man signifies a substance along with all those differentia that are in man, such as sensibility and mortality.” (S., p.156) The teacher points out that the case of “man” is not similar to that of “expert in grammar.” “[Y]ou do not consider how dissimilarly the name ‘man’ signifies those things of which a man consists, and how expert in grammar [signifies] man and grammar. Truly, the name ‘man’ signifies by itself and as one thing those things of which the entire man consists.” (S., p.156)

“Expert in grammar,” however, signifies “man” and “grammar” in different ways. It signifies “grammar” by itself (per se); it signifies “man” by something else (per aliud). Expertise in grammar is an accident of man, so “expert in grammar” cannot signify “man” in any unconditioned sense, but rather is something said of man (appellative hominis). The man is the underlying substance in which there can be grammar, and the underlying substance can be expert in grammar.

So, “expert in grammar” can rightly be understood in accordance with Aristotle’s Categories as a quality, because it signifies a quality. At the same time, “expert in grammar” is said of a substance, that is to say, man. This still raises some problems in the mind of the student, who suggests “expert in grammar” could be a having, or under the category of having, and asks whether a single thing can be of several categories. The teacher, conceding that the issue requires further study, maintains, directing the student through several examples, that a single expression that signifies more than one thing can be in more than one category, provided the things that are signified are not signified as actually one thing.

9. The De Veritate

This dialogue, which Anselm describes in its preface as one of “three treatises pertaining to the study of Sacred Scripture,” dealing with “what truth is, in what things [quibus rebus] truth is customarily said to be, and what justice is” (S., v. 1, p. 173), begins with a student asking for a definition of truth. The dialogical lesson takes the truth of statements as a starting point. A statement is true “[w]hen what it states [quod enuntiat], whether in affirming or in negating, is so [est].” (S., v. 1, p. 177) Given this, Anselm’s theory of truth appears at first glance a simple correspondence theory, where truth consists in the correspondence between statements and states of affairs signified by those statements.

His theory is more complex, however, and relies on a Platonic notion of participation, or more accurately stated, weds together a correspondence theory with a Platonic participational view. “[N]othing is true except by participating in truth; and so the truth of the true thing is in the true thing itself. But truly the thing stated is not in the true statement. So, it [the thing stated] should not be called its truth, but the cause of its truth. For this reason it seems to me that the truth of the statement should be sought only in the language itself [ipsa oratione].” (S., v. 1, p. 177) It is very important at this point to keep in mind that Anselm is not saying that all truth is simply in language, but rather that the truth of statements, truth of signification, lies in the language used. The truth of the statement cannot be the statement itself, nor can it be the statement’s signifying, nor the statement’s “definition,” for in any of these cases, the statement would always be true. Instead, statements are true when they signify correctly or rightly, and Anselm provides the key term for his larger theory of truth, “rectitude” or “rightness.” “Therefore its [an affirmation’s] truth is not something different than rightness [rectitudo].” (S., p. 178)

Anselm notes, however, that even when a statement affirms that what-is-not is, or vice versa, there is stillsome truth or correctness to the statement. This is so because there are two kinds of truth in signifying, for a statement can signify that what is the case is the case, and it does signify what it signifies. “There is one rightness and truth of the statement because it signifies what it was made to signify [ad quod significandum facta est]; and, there is another, when it signifies that which it received the capacity to signify [quod accepit significare].” (S., p. 179)

Accordingly, for Anselm, the truth of statements consists in part in the correspondence of the statement to the state of affairs signified, but also in the signification itself, the sense or meaning of the statement. “It always possesses the latter kind of truth, but does not always possess the former. For, it has the latter kind naturally, but the former kind accidentally and according to usage.” (S., p.179) For example, the expression “it is day” always possesses the second kind of truth, since the expression can always signify what it does signify; in other words, it can convey a meaning. But, whether or not it possesses the first kind of truth depends on whether in fact it is day. According to Anselm, in certain statements, the two kinds of truth or correctness are inseparable from each other, examples of these being universal statements, such as “man is an animal.”

He goes on to discuss truth of other kinds, in thought, in the will, in action, in the senses, and in the being of things. Truth in thought is analogous to truth in signification, but Anselm discusses only the first kind of truth, where thoughts correspond to actual states of affairs, this being “rightness” of thought. Truth in the will likewise consists in rightness, in other words, willing what it is that one ought to will. With respect to actions, again truth is rightness, in this case goodness. “To do good [bene facere] and to do evil [male facere] are contraries. For this reason, if to do the truth [veritatem facere] and to do good are the same in opposition, they are not different in their signification. . . . [T]o do what is right [rectitudinem facere] is to do the truth… Nothing is more apparent then than that the truth of an action is its rightness.” (S., p. 182)

But Anselm distinguishes between natural actions, such as a fire heating, which are non-rational and necessary, and non-natural actions, such as giving alms, which are rational and non-necessary. The natural type is always true, like the second kind of truth in signification. The non-natural type is sometimes true, sometimes false, like the first kind of truth in signification. Truth of the senses, Anselm argues, is a misnomer, as the truth or falsity involving the senses is not in the senses but in the “judgment” (in opinione). “The inner sense itself makes an error [se fallit], rather than the exterior sense lying to it.” (S., p. 183)

Speaking of the second kind of truth in signification, and of the truth of natural actions involves reference to a “Supreme Truth,” namely, God. Everything that is, insofar as it is receives its being [quod est] from the Supreme Truth. An argument, placed in the mouth of the dialogue’s teacher, follows from this: 1) “If all things are this, i.e. what they are there [in the Supreme Truth], without a doubt they are what they ought to be.” 2) “But whatever is what it ought to be is rightly [recte est]. “Thus, everything that is, is rightly.” (S, p. 185)

This, however, seems to present a genuine and serious problem, given the existence and experience of evil, specifically, “many deeds done evilly” (multa opera male), in the world as we know it. In order to address this, Anselm resorts to the traditional distinction between God causing and God permitting evil. Evil actions and evil willing ought not to be, but what happens when God permits it, because He permits it, ought to be. The solution to this puzzle lies in further distinction. “For in many ways the same matter [eadem res] supports opposites when considered from different perspectives [diversis considerationibus]. This often happens to be the case for an action. . . .” (S., p. 187)

Anselm uses the example of a “beating” (percussio), which can be regarded both as an action, on the part of the agent, and as a passion, on the part of the passive sufferer. Both the active and the passive are necessarily connected. “For a beating is of the one acting and of the one suffering, whence it can be said of either the action [giving a beating] and the passion [getting a beating].” (S., p. 187) While these two are necessarily connected, the same is not true of the judgments that can be made regarding each side of the action, for instance the rightness of the action or the suffering. A person might be rightly beaten, but it may be wrong for this or that person to give the beating. The implication of this is that “it can happen that according to nature an action or a passion should be, but in respect to the person acting or the person suffering should not be, since neither should the former do it nor the latter suffer it.” (S., p. 188) In this case, and other similar cases, it is possible for the same thing to have seemingly contradictory determinations. The key here, however, is that the same thing is being “considered from different perspectives [diversis considerationibus]” (S., p. 188)

Anselm then brings all of the other kinds of truth back to the truth of signification, not reducing them all to signification, but rather indicating how they are connected to each other. “For, there is true or false signification not only in those things we are accustomed to call signs but also in all of the other things that we have spoken of. For, since something should not be done by someone unless it is something that someone should do, by the very fact that someone does something, he says and he signifies that he ought to do that thing.” (S., p. 189) In every action, according to this doctrine, there is an implicit assertion of truth being made (rightly or wrongly) by the agent. For example, an expert tells a non-expert that certain herbs are non-poisonous, but avoids eating them, his action’s (true) signification being more trustworthy than his (false) signification in his statement. This applies even further.

So likewise, if you did not know that one ought not to lie and somebody lied in your presence, then even if he were to tell you that he himself ought not to lie, he would himself tell you more by his deed [opere] that he ought to lie than by his words that he ought not [to lie]. Similarly, when somebody thinks of or wills something, if you did not know whether he ought to will or think of that thing, and if you could see his willing or his thought, he would signify to you by that very action [ipso opere] that he ought to think about and will that thing. And, if he did ought to do so, he would speak the truth. But if not, he would lie. (S., p. 189)

In Anselm’s parlance, it is possible for action, willing, and thinking to be false, in other words, to be lies on the part of the acting, willing, or thinking subject. This involves a reference, noted earlier, to the Supreme Truth, God, more specifically to the truth of the being of things as they are in the Supreme Truth. All of the types of truth or rightness are ultimately determined or conditioned by the Supreme Truth, which is “the cause of all other truths and rightnesses.” Some of these other truths are themselves in turn causes as well as effects, while others are simply effects. “Since the truth that is in the existence of things is an effect of the Supreme Truth, this is also the cause of the truth belonging to thoughts and the truth that is in propositions; but these two truths are not the cause of any truth.” (S., p. 189)

After having carried out these dialogic investigations of the various kinds of truth, Anselm is now ready to provide a definition: “Accordingly, unless I am mistaken, we can establish the definition that [definire quia] truth is rightness perceptible only to the mind.” (S., p. 191) This introduces the final discussion of the dialogue, the student asking: “But since you have taught me that all truth is rightness, and since rightness seems to me to be the same thing as justice, teach me also what I might understand justice to be.” (S., p. 191) The teacher’s first response is that justice, truth, and rightness are convertible with each other. “[W]hen we are speaking of rightness perceptible only to the mind, truth and rightness and justice are mutually defined in relation to each other [invicem sese definiunt].” (S., p. 192) This relationship allows the rational investigating human being to use one of these terms, or rather their understanding of the meaning of the terms, to arrive at understanding of the others (which is in fact what is going on in the dialogue itself) “[I]f somebody knows one of them and does not know the others, he can extend his knowledge [scientiam pertingere] though the known to the unknown. Verily, whoever knows one cannot not know the other two.” (S., p. 192)

Justice, however, has a sense more specific and appropriate to humans, “the justice to which praise is owed, just as to its contrary, namely injustice, condemnation is owed.” (S., p. 192) This sort of justice, Anselm argues, resides only in beings that know rightness, and therefore can will it. Accordingly, this kind of justice is present only in rational beings, and in human beings, it is not in knowledge or action but in the will. Justice is then defined as “rightness of will,” and as this could allow instances where one wills rightly, in other words what he or she ought to will, without wanting to be in such a situation, or instances where one does so want, but wills the right object for a bad motive, the definition of justice is further specified as “rightness of will kept for its own sake” (propter se servata). Anselm makes clear that this uprightness is received from God prior to the human being having it, willing it, or keeping it. And, it is in a certain way radically dependent on God’s own justice. “If we say that [God’s] uprightness is kept for its own sake, we do not seem to be able to suitably [conuenienter] speak likewise about any other rightness. For just as [God’s uprightness] itself and not some other thing, preserves itself, it is not through another but through itself, and likewise not on account of another thing but on account of itself.” (S., p. 196)

This leads to the final topic of the De Veritate, the unity of truth. According to Anselm, although there is a multiplicity of true things, and multiple and different ways for things to be truth, there is ultimately only one truth, prior to all of these, and in which they participate. From the discussions in earlier treatises, it is clear that this single and ultimate truth is, of course, God.

10. The De Libertate Arbitrii

This treatise is the second of the three treatises pertaining to the study of Sacred Scripture, and it deals primarily with the nature of the human will and its relation to the justice or rightness of will discussed at the end of the De Veritate. The student begins by asking the central questions:

Since free choice [liberum arbitrium] seems to be opposed to God’s grace, and predestination, and foreknowledge, I desire to know what this free choice is and whether we always have it. For if free choice is “to be able to sin and not sin,” just as it is customarily said by some people, and we always have it, in what way can we be in need of any grace? For if we do not always have it, why is sin imputed to us when we would sin without free choice. (S., v. 1, p. 207)

The immediate response is the denial that freedom of choice is or includes the ability to sin, for this would mean that God and the good angels, who cannot sin, would not have free choice. Anselm is unwilling even to entirely distinguish free choice of God and good angels from that of humans. “Although the free choice of humans differs from the free choice of God and the good angels, still the definition of this freedom, in accordance with this name, ought to be the same in either case.” (S., p. 208)

It appears at first that a will which can turn towards sinning or not sinning is more free, but this is to be able to lose what befits and what is useful or advantageous for (quod decet et quod expedit) the one willing. To be able to sin is actually an ability to become more unfree. Key to the argument is that not sinning is understood as a positive condition of maintaining uprightness or righteousness (rectitudo). Anselm makes two key points in support of this. “The will that cannot turn away from the righteousness of not sinning is thereby freer than one that can desert it [righteousness].” (S., p. 208) The analysis of the conceptions of freedom, sin, and power are similar to those in Proslogion Chapter 7: “The ability to sin, therefore, which when added to the will decreases its freedom and when taken away increases it, is neither freedom nor a part of freedom.” (S., v. 1, p. 209)

This raises two problems, however. Both the fallen angels and the first human were able to sin and did sin. Given the argument just made, being able to sin and freedom seem foreign (aliena) to each other, but if one does not sin from free choice, it seems one must sin of necessity. In addition, the notion of being a “servant of sin” requires clarification, specifically explaining how a free being can be mastered by sin, and thereby become a servant. Anselm makes a subtle distinction. In the case of the first man or the fallen angel, the Devil:

He sinned by his choice which was free, but not through that from which [unde] it was free, i.e. by the ability through which he was able to [per potestatem qua poterat] not sin and to not serve sin, but rather by the ability of sinning that he had [per potestatem quam habebat peccandi], by which he was neither aided toward the freedom of not sinning nor compelled to the service of sinning. (S., v. 1, p. 210)

Analogously to this, if somebody is able to be the servant of sin, this does not mean that sin is able to master him, so that his choice to sin, to become a servant of sin, is not free. Another question arises then, how a person, after becoming a servant of sin, would still be free, to which the answer is that one still retains some natural freedom of choice, but is unable to use one’s freedom of choice in exactly the same way as one could prior to choosing to sin. (Later in Chapter 12, Anselm clarifies that being a “servant of sin” is precisely “an inability to avoid sinning.”)

The difference, however, is all important. The freedom of choice which they originally possessed was oriented towards an end, that of “willing what they ought to will and what is advantageous for them to will,” (S., p. 211) in other words, uprightness or righteousness (rectitudo) of will. Anselm then considers four different possible ways in which they had this freedom oriented towards righteousness or uprightness of will:

  1. whether for acquiring it without anyone giving it, since they did not yet have it
  2. whether for receiving it when they did not yet have it, if someone were to give it to them so that they might have it
  3. whether for deserting what they received and for recovering by themselves what they had deserted
  4. whether for always keeping it once it was received (S., v. 1, p. 211)

The first three possibilities are rejected, leaving only the fourth. Rational creatures were originally given uprightness of will, which they were obliged to keep, but free (in one sense) to keep or lose. Freedom of choice, however, has a reason, namely, keeping this original uprightness-of-will for its own sake.

There are then two different possible states. So long as one keeps uprightness-of-will for its own sake, one does so freely. Once one loses uprightness-of-will through use of one’s free choice, one no longer has the ability to keep uprightness-of-will, really by definition, since one has after all lost it. Here, Anselm clarifies: “Even if uprightness of will is lacking, still [a] rational nature does not possess less than what belongs to it. For, as I view it, we have no ability that by itself suffices unto itself for its action; and still, when those things are lacking without which our abilities can hardly be brought to action, we still no less say that we have those abilities that are in us.” (S., p. 212-3)

He employs two analogies, one general, and one more specific. One can have an ability or an instrument that can accomplish something, but when the conditions for its employment are lacking, it cannot by itself bring anything about. Likewise, seeing a mountain requires not only sight, but also light and a mountain actually being there to be seen. When uprightness of will is lacking, having been lost, one still has theability to keep it, but the conditions for having and keeping it are lacking. “What prevents us from having the power of keeping uprightness of will for sake of that very uprightness, even if this very uprightness is absent, so long as within us there is reason, by which we are able to recognize it, and will, by which we are able to hold onto it? For the freedom of choice spoken of here consists in both of these [ex his enim constat].” (S., p. 214)

Chapters 5-9 discuss temptation, specifically how the will can be overcome by temptation, thereby turning away from or losing uprightness-of-will, by willing an action (for example, lying, murder, theft, adultery) contrary to God’s will. Anselm concedes that a person can be placed in a situation where options are constrained, and where unwelcome consequences follow from every option, for instance, when a person is constrained to choose between lying and thereby avoiding death (for a while), and dying. The will is stronger than any temptation, or even the Devil himself, but both temptation and the Devil can create difficulties for the resisting person, and can constrain the situations of choice. In these cases, the will can allow itself to be overcome. This still involves free choice of the will, but this is a free choice for one sort of unfreedom or another. Anselm argues that “a rational nature always possesses free choice, since it always possesses the ability of keeping uprightness of will for the sake of this rightness itself, even though with difficulty at some times.” (S., p. 222)

Once this uprightness has been lost, or rather abandoned freely, the free human being becomes a servant of sin because it cannot by itself regain that uprightness on its own. “Indeed, just as no will, before it possessed uprightness, was able to acquire it unless God gave it, so, after it deserted what it had received, it is not able to regain it unless God gives it back.” (S., p. 222) In such a condition, a human being remains free in the sense that they could keep uprightness-of-will, in other words, not sin, precisely by freely choosing to keep it, if they had it, which they do not. Once God gives it again, a human being is then once again free to keep it or to lose it. Freedom in the full sense for Anselm, therefore, consists in the ability to keep uprightness-of-will for its own sake, that is to say, choosing and acting in such a way as to keep oneself from losing it, even when faced with temptation.

11. The De Casu Diaboli

This dialogue, considerably longer than the preceding De Veritate and De Libertate, further develops certain themes they raised, and addresses several other philosophical issues of major importance, including the nature of evil and negation, and the complexities of the will. The dialogue begins in an attempt to understand the implications of all created beings having nothing that they have not received from God. “No creature has anything [aliud] from itself. For what does not even have itself from itself, in what way could it have anything from itself?” (S., v. 1, p. 233) Only God, the Creator, alone has anything (quidquid) from himself. All other beings, as dependent on God for their being, have what they have from him. The student raises an initial problem in Chapter 1, having to do with divine causation. It seems then that God is the cause not only of created beings having something, and for their being, but also that God is then the cause for their passing into non-being. This would then mean that God is the cause not only for whatever is, but also for whatever is not.

The teacher makes a needed distinction here. A thing is said to cause another thing to be in several different cases. One who actually causes something else to be is properly said to cause it. When one able to cause something not to be does not so cause it, and then the thing is (because the first thing does not interfere with the second thing being or coming to be), the first thing is improperly said to cause the second. Accordingly, God is said to cause things in both ways. God is also improperly said to cause what is not not to be, when what is actually meant by this is that God simply does not cause it to be. Likewise, when things pass from being to not-being, God does not cause this, even though he does not conserve them in being, because they simply return to their original state of non-being.

This has a bearing on the question of divine responsibility for evil, setting up the other problems of the dialogue.

Just as nothing that is not good comes from the Supreme Good, and every good is from the Supreme Good, likewise nothing that is not being [essentia] comes from the Supreme Being [essentia], and all being is from the Supreme Being. Since the Supreme Good is the Supreme Being, it follows that every being is a good thing and every good thing is a being. Therefore, just as nothing and non-being [non esse] are not being [essentia], likewise they are not good. So, nothing and non-being are not from He from whom nothing is unless it is good and being. (S., p. 235)

The central problem is that of understanding how the Devil could be responsible for his own sin, given that what he has he has from God, and the lengthy argumentation in Chapter 3 sets in clear light the problem’s complex nature. It seems that there is an inconsistency between God’s goodness and the justness of his judgment, on the one hand, and the Devil not receiving perseverance from God who did not give it to him, on the other hand. The student is making the global assumption, however, that since giving X is the cause of X being received, not giving X is the cause of X not being received.

In some cases this does not hold, however, and the teacher supplies an example. “If I offer [porrigo] you something, and you accept it [accipis], I do not therefore give it because you receive it [accipis], but you therefore receive it because I give it, and the giving is the cause of the receiving.” (S., p. 236) In that positive case, the giving is the cause of the receiving, but, if the case is made negative the order of causing what takes place (or rather what does not take place) is the opposite. “What if I offer that very thing to someone else and he does not accept it? Does he therefore not accept it because I do not give it?” The student realizes that the proper way of looking at matters is “rather that you do not give it because he does not accept it.” (S., p. 236) In cases like these, where not-giving X is not the cause of X not being received, if one does not give X, it can still be inferred that X is not received. This answer does not quell the student’s initial misgivings, however, for it simply pushes the fundamental problem back further. “If you wish to assert that God did not give to him because he did not receive, I ask: why did he not receive? Was it because he was not able to, or because he did not will to? For if he did not have the ability or the will to receive [potestatem aut uoluntatem accipiendi], God did not give it.” (S., p. 237) This seems to place the responsibility for the Devil’s lack back on God, and the student asks: “[I]f he was not able to have the ability or the will to receive perseverance unless God gives it, in what did he sin, by not accepting what God did not give him to be able or to will to receive [posse aut uelle accipere]?” (S., p. 237)

The answer is that God in fact did give this ability and will, and the student concludes that the Devil did receive perseverance from God. The teacher makes two important clarifications. The first is that “I did not say that God gave him the receiving of perseverance [accipere perseuerantiam], but rather to be able or to will to [posse aut uelle] receive perseverance.” (S., p. 237) The student then concludes that since the Devil willed to and was able to (voluit et potuit) receive perseverance, he did in fact receive it.

This leads to the second, much more involved clarification. There are cases where one is able to and wills to do something, but does not finish it or bring it about completely or perfectly, cases where one’s initial will is changed before the thing is entirely finished.

T: Then, you willed and you were able to persevere in what you did not persevere.
S: Certainly I willed to, but I did not persevere in willing [in voluntate], and so I did not persevere in the action.
T: Why did you not persevere in willing?
S: Because I did not will to.
T: But, so long as you willed to persevere in the action, you willed to persevere in that willing [in voluntate]? (S., p. 238)

The will is marked by a reflexivity, as the student recognizes when the teacher asks why he did not persevere in willing. One can answer that he did not persevere in willing (which is the reason he did not then continue to will) because he did not will to. This type of explanation could be iterated infinitely, and would not really explain anything thereby. Instead, the explanation for failure of will (defectus. . . uoluntatis) requires reference to something else, and this requires coining a new expression. As the teacher says: “Let us say. . . . that to persevere in willing is to ‘will completely’ [peruelle].”(S., p. 238) And, he asks his student: “When, therefore, you did not complete what you willed to and were able to, why did you not complete it?” In response, the student supplies the conclusion: “Because I did not will it completely.” (S., p. 238) This allows a partial resolution to the problem: even though the Devil received the will and the ability to receive perseverance and the will and the ability to persevere, he did not actually receive the perseverance because he did not will it completely. Again, this answer simply pushes the problem to yet another level, leading the student to ask:

Again I ask why he did not will completely. For when you say that what he willed he did not completely will, you are saying something like: What he willed at first, he did not will later. So, when he did not will what he willed before, why did he not will it unless because he did not have the will to? And by this latter I do not mean the will that he had previously when he willed it but the one that he did not have when he did not will it. But why did he not have this will, unless because he did not receive it? And, why did he not receive it, unless because God did not give it? (S., p. 239)

The teacher reminds the student of the point established earlier, that God did not give to the Devil because the Devil did not receive. Again the failure is on the side of the creature, and at this point, the teacher asserts that the Devil could have received keeping (tenere) what he had but instead abandoned or deserted it (deseruit). The relation between not-receiving and desertion has a parallel structure to not-giving and not-receiving: the Devil did not receive because he deserted, and God did not give to the Devilbecause the Devil did not receive.

Once again, this is only a partial solution, and it still seems that God could be responsible for the fall of the Devil, because God did not give something to the Devil, namely the will to keep, not to desert, what he had. The cause for someone deserting something, the student claims, is because that person does not will to keep it. The teacher’s response here is similar to the previous responses, since he distinguishes cases where the causal relation the student asserts to hold does not hold. It is dissimilar, however, and brings the complex argumentation of Chapter 3 to a close, because it introduces the key notion of conflicting objects of the will. Using the example of a miser who would will both to keep his money and to have bread, which requires him to spend money, the teacher notes that in this case, willing to desert is prior to not willing to keep some good, precisely because one wills to desert the thing in order to have something that one prefers to have. In the case of the Devil then:

the reason he did not will when he should have and what he should have was not that his will was deficient [defecit] because God failed [deo . . .deficiente] to give, but rather that the Devil himself, by willing what he should not have, expelled his good will because of an evil will arising. Accordingly, it was not because he did not have a good persevering will or he did not receive it, because God did not give it, but rather that God did not give it because the Devil, by willing what he should not have, deserted the good will, and by deserting it did not keep it. (S., p. 240)

In Chapters 4-28, issues raised by this solution to the problem are explored: the complex nature of the will, and the ontological status of evil, nothing, and injustice. Chapter 4 introduces a key distinction in objects of the will, between justice (justitia) and what is beneficial, useful, or agreeable (commodum). The case of the Devil is the case for rational, willing creatures generally. The teacher notes: “He could not have willed anything except for justice or what is beneficial. For, happiness, which all rational natures will, consists of beneficial things.” And, the student confirms this: “We can recognize this in ourselves, who will nothing except what we deem to be just or beneficial.” (S., p. 241)

The Devil went wrong by willing something beneficial, but which he did not have and was not supposed to have at the time he willed it; this was to will in a disordered manner (inordinate), and hereby to will the beneficial thing in such a way as to thereby not keep justice, precisely because willing the beneficial thing in a disordered way required abandoning justice. The Devil willed to be both like God and above God, by willing in such a way as to reject the order God introduced into things (including wills), or put in another way, using a term that somewhat resists translation: “he willed something by his very own will alone [propria voluntate], which was subject [subdita] to nobody. For it should be for God alone to so will something by his very own will alone, so that he does not follow a will superior [to his own].” (S., p. 242)

The will, in both angels and human beings, is complex, and can be regarded from different though complementary points of view, and in terms of its objects, which may differ or coincide. Chapters 12-14 discuss the relationships between the will, happiness, and justice. There are two fundamental kinds of good and two kinds of evil: justice (justitia) and what is beneficial, useful, or agreeable (commodum); injustice, and what is harmful or unpleasant (incommodum). Rational beings, as well as other beings that can perceive, have a natural will for avoiding what is harmful or unpleasant (incommodum) and for possessing what is beneficial, useful, or agreeable (commodum), and by this natural will, which is for happiness, they move themselves to willing other things, such as means by which to achieve the good they will.

In contrast, rational beings can be just or unjust, and can will justice or injustice. While all rational beings will happiness, not all of them will justice. It is possible for the two wills to conflict, and for one to will happiness inordinately, and in this way desert justice. Alternately, it is possible for one to will justice, which affects how happiness is willed.

Justice, when it is added, would so temper the will for happiness, that it would both curb the will’s excess and not cut off its ability of exceeding. So, because one would will to be happy, one could go to excess [excedere], but because one would will justly, one would not will to go to excess [excedere], and so having a just will for happiness one could and should be happy. And, by not willing what one ought not will, even though one could, one would merit being able to never will what should not be willed, and by always keeping justice through a restrained [moderatam] will, one would in no way be in need; but, if one were to desert justice through an unrestrained [immoderatam] will, one would be in need in every way. (S., p. 258)

Chapters 15-16 show that the relation between justice and injustice is one of a good and its privation, or put another way, justice is something, meaning it has goodness and it has being, while injustice is nothing but the absence or privation of the justice that should exist, namely in a will. The priority of justice over injustice means that the will retains traces (vestigia) of the justice it abandoned, namely that it ought to have justice. Injustice, or the state of being unjust, does not have any being, meaning it is nothing.

The relationships between evil, injustice, nothing, and the will are explained in Chapters 7-11, 19-20, and 26. First, as the teacher explains, the will itself, considered as will is not nothing. “Now, even if [the will, and the turning of the will] are not substances, still it cannot be proven that they are not beings [essentias], for there are many beings other than those which are properly called ‘substances.’ So then, a good will is not more something than an evil will is, nor is the latter more evil than the former is good.” (S., p. 245) The conclusion of this is not that the evil will is not in fact evil, but rather that “the evil will is not that very evil that makes evil people evil.” (S., p. 245)

The evil that makes people evil is instead injustice, the privation of justice, which is nothing. Saying that injustice and evil are in fact nothing raises a problem, however, for it does seem as if injustice and evil aresomething. For one, it seems that good and evil are both correlative to each other. “[E]vil is a privation of the good, I concede, but I see that good is no less the privation of evil. (S., p. 247) Posing a second difficulty, it seems that “evil” must signify something, since “evil” is a name. Lastly, the effects of evil seem in our experience to be something, so it seems paradoxical to insist that their cause is “nothing.”

These difficulties are resolved in several ways. First, as noted earlier, the relationship between evil or injustice as a privation, and its opposite, justice, is not a reciprocal one. Injustice is the privation of justice, justice is not the privation of injustice, but that which injustice is a privation of. Put another way, justice is something positive, and has being, and its being is not dependent upon or conditioned by its opposite and privation, injustice.

A second resolution lies in noting that “nothing” does signify, but signifies by negation. As the teacher says, making an important distinction:

“[E]vil” and “nothing” do signify something; still though what they signify is not evil or nothing. But, there is another way in which they signify something and what is signified is something; not truly something, though, but as-if something [quasi aliquid]. For indeed, many things are said in accordance with the form [of language] [secundum formam], which are not said in accordance with the reality [secundum rem]. (S., p. 250)So, in this way, “evil” and “nothing” signify something, and what is signified is something not in accordance with the reality but in accordance with the form of speaking. (S., p. 251)

A third resolution resides in explaining the relationship between the evil and nothing(ness) of injustice and the seeming positivity and being of things that get called evil. The will itself, as something, is good; in-itself, willing objects of the will, from the basest pleasures to being-like God, is good. Even the base and unclean useful or pleasurable things that irrational animals take pleasure in (commoda infima et immunda quibusirrationalia animalia delectanturS., p. 257) are in themselves good. What allows some positive existing thing to be an evil is the disorder it is involved in, and this has to do with the will, and with injustice as such, which are the source of any positivity evil has. “[S]ince no thing is called “evil” except for an evil will or on account of an evil will – like an evil man and an evil action – nothing is clearer than that no thing is evil, nor is evil anything but the absence of the justice that has been deserted in the will, or in some thing because of an evil will.” (S., p. 264)The absence of justice in the will, or injustice, is always strictly speaking nothing, the absence or lack of what ought to be. However, “sometimes the evil that is harmful or unpleasant (incommodum) is clearly nothing, like blindness, other times it is something, like sadness or pain.” (S., p. 274) What we typically focus on in thinking about evil are the latter cases. “When, then, we hear the word ‘evil,’ we do not fear the evil that is nothing, but the evil that is something, which follows from the absence of the good. For, from injustice and blindness, which are evil and which are nothing, follow many harmful or unpleasant things (incommoda) that are evil and are something, and these are what we dread when we hear the word ‘evil.’” (S., p. 274)

Accordingly, returning to the original issue, what creatures have that is good, they have from God, and what they have of evil derives from them (or from other creatures), but ultimately from nothing, that is to say, from a lack of what ought to be (or of what ought to have been). In any given case, of course, for instance the Devil’s case, it may take considerable analysis to see how what God gave permitted evil to take place.

12. The De Concordia

This late work is of particular interest for several reasons. In its content, it deals with matters examined by Anselm’s previous works, developing his doctrines further. The De Concordia refers to earlier works by name, specifically De Veritate, De Libertate Arbitrii, De Casu Diaboli, and De Conceptu Virginali et de Originali Peccato. Stylistically, its form is intermediary between those of the treatises and those of the dialogues, for Anselm addresses the possible objections and responses of an interlocutor in the first book, but does so within one continuous discourse. By the second and third books, Anselm no longer addresses an interlocutor. The three main topics or “questions” of the title unevenly divide the books of the work.

The first question, or problem, is how free choice (liberum arbitrium) and God’s foreknowledge could be compatible. This is really a clash between freedom and necessity. “[I]t is necessary [necesse est] that those things that God foreknows be going to happen [esse futura], and those that come to be through free choice do not arrive through any necessity.” (S., v. 2, p. 245) Anselm’s procedure is to assume both free choice and God’s foreknowledge in order to see whether they do in fact contradict each other, reasoning that, if they are genuinely incompatible, some other impossibility will arise from them. The assumption does not in fact generate a contradiction.

[I]f something is going to happen without necessity [sine necessitate], God, who foreknows all future things foreknows this very thing. So, what God foreknows necessarily [necessitate] is going to happen, just as it is foreknown. Accordingly, it is necessary [necesse est] for something to be going to happen without necessity. Therefore, for one who rightly understands this, the foreknowledge upon which necessity follows and the free choice from which necessity is removed do not seem contradictory at all, since it is necessary that God foreknows what is going to happen, and God foreknows something to be going to happen without any necessity. (S., p. 245)

The interlocutor raises several objections. The first is easily resolved, since it consists in simply shifting the ground from actions in general to sinning. Since God foreknows whether a person will sin or not, it seems that it is then necessary that a person sins or does not sin. Anselm simply makes explicit the full significance of what is being asserted, after which it is clear that framing the issue in terms of sin simply generates the same structure. “You should not say just: ‘God foreknows that I am going to sin or I am not going to sin,’ but rather: ‘God foreknows that without necessity I am going to sin or I am not going to sin.’” (S., p. 246)

The second objection raises a puzzle that stems from the sense of “necessity.” “Necessity seems to mean [sonare] compulsion or restraint [coactionem uel prohibitionem]. So, if it is necessary that I sin from my willing, I understand myself to be compelled by some hidden force to the will to sin; and if I do not sin, I am restrained from the will to sin.” (S., p. 246-7) In response, Anselm notes that some things are said to necessarily be or not be, even when there is no compulsion or restraint. In the case of voluntary actions, God foreknows them, but this foreknowledge does not produce any compulsion or restraint. To the contrary, God foreknows them precisely as voluntary actions. There is a necessity involved, but one that “follows,” rather than “precedes,” or determines, the thing or event.

Anselm provides examples of these two modalities of necessity. An uprising that is going to take place tomorrow does not occur by necessity. It could happen otherwise, although it will not. The sun rising tomorrow will happen by necessity. It must happen that way.

The uprising, which will not be from necessity, is asserted to be going to happen only by a following necessity [sequenti necessitate], since what is going to happen is being said of what is going to happen. For, if it is going to happen tomorrow, by necessity it is going to happen. The sunrise, however, is understood to be going to happen by both kinds of necessity, namely the preceding [praecedenti] necessity that makes the thing be – so it will be, since it is necessary [necesse est] that it be – and the following necessity that does not compel it to be. (S., p. 250)

When one says that it is necessary for what God foreknows to happen, care is needed lest these different modalities of necessity get mixed up. In the case of human willing, the necessity is of the following, not the preceding kind. There is a temporality involved in the necessity of human will.

What the free will wills, the free will can and cannot not-will [non velle], and it is necessary that it will. For, it can not-will before it wills, since it is free, and once it wills, it cannot not-will, but rather it is necessary that it will, since it is impossible for it to will and not will the same thing at the same time. . . . there is a twofold necessity, because [what the will freely wills] is compelled to be by the will, and what happens cannot at the same time not happen. But the free will makes these necessities, which can avoid them [coming to be] before they are. (S., p. 251)

Far from free will being incompatible with necessity and with God’s foreknowledge, free will is in fact productive of some necessity. Anselm employs a line of reasoning similar to that used in earlier works, most notably in the De Veritate. “Why then is it something astonishing if in this way something is from freedom and from necessity, when there are many things that are grasped in opposite ways by changing the point of view [diverse ratione]?” (S., p. 253) Employing this technique of distinction allows him the conclude that they are in fact compatible: “No inconsistency arises if, in accordance with the reasons given earlier, we assert one and the same thing to be necessarily going to be, since it is going to be, and that it is by no necessity compelled to be going to be, unless by that necessity that was said earlier to come to be from free will.” (S., p. 253)

In Chapter 5, ultimately in order to be able to provide a hermeneutic for seemingly problematic Scriptural passages, Anselm provides readers with an intellectual glimpse of eternity. Within eternity, there is no past or future, but only present; not the fleeting present of our temporal experience, but an eternal present, one that has an ontological priority over time as we experience it. “Although nothing is there except what is present, it is not the temporal present, like ours, but rather the eternal, within which all times altogether are contained. If in a certain way the present time contains every place and all the things that are in any place, likewise, every time is encompassed [clauditur] in the eternal present, and everything that is in any time.” (S., p. 254)

The nature of temporal things is that, insofar as they are in time, they do not always exist, and they change from time to time, whereas, as they exist in eternity, they always exist and are unchangeable. Anselm again frames this in terms of different points of view. Something can be able to be changed in time and still be unchangeable in eternity “For things that are changeable in time and unchangeable in eternity are not more opposed than not being in some time is to always being in eternity, or having been or going to be in accordance with time and not having been or not going to be in eternity.” (S., p. 255) This allows a fuller understanding of the relation between God’s foreknowledge and free choice. Before (in the temporal sequence) something is willed by a being existing in time, such as sinning or not sinning, it can be otherwise. It already exists in eternity, however, which is how God knows (or from our point of view, foreknows) it.

Anselm deals briefly with the second question or problem, reconciling predestination with free choice. This question seems to present a more problematic issue than divine foreknowledge. One can, as Anselm does, reconcile divine foreknowledge with free human choices by taking the position that God knows the free human choices as free, but from a vantage point of eternity, in which the free, uncompelled or restrained human actions have already happened, or more properly expressed are already happening. Predestination, however, seems to involve God making things happen the way they do. There is a possible resolution, however; we can say: “God predestines evil people and their evil works when he does not correct them and their evil works. But he is said to foreknow and predestine good things, because he causes [facit] that they be and that they be good; but for evil things, he only causes them to be what they are essentially, not that they are evil.” (S., p. 261) That is, (in accordance with the positions developed in Anselm’s earlier works), God never directly causes something evil, but rather provides the basis, in being and goodness, for what is then turned to evil, turned away from how it ought to be.

God does predestine human actions, according to Anselm, but he predestines them precisely as free or voluntary actions, which does not impose a necessity upon them that does not come from the choosing person’s willing, by the sort of following necessity discussed in relation to foreknowledge.

For God – even though He predestines – does not cause [facit] these things by compelling or restraining the will, but rather by committing [dimittendo] it to its own power. But even though the will uses its own power, it does nothing that God does not do in good things by his grace, in bad things not by fault of his own will but the will of the person. . . And just as foreknowledge, which does not err, only foreknows what is true, just as it will be, whether it is necessary or spontaneous, likewise, predestination . . . predestines a thing only as it is in foreknowledge. (S., p. 261)

The third question or problem is reconciling God’s grace and human free choice. In the course of showing that there is no real contradiction between these, Anselm’s treatment ranges over a number of issues. There are a variety of different viewpoints to be considered. Some, supporting themselves by appeal to Scripture, maintain that only divine grace leads to salvation; others, likewise appealing to other Scriptural passages, maintain that salvation depends on our will. Furthering the first position, some cite passages that seem to have good works and salvation depend on grace, and others point to the common enough experience of people who, despite their efforts, fail. In addition to Scriptural passages that teach that humans have free choice, or that urge people to do good and that condemn evil, there is a line of reasoning supporting free choice, namely: “If nobody were to do good or evil through free choice, then there would be no reason why [nec ullo modo esset cur] God justly gives what they deserve [retribueret] to good people and bad people on account of the merits of each one.” (S., p. 264)

The position that Anselm develops can be summarized as the following: Grace and free choice are not only compatible, but they in fact cooperate with each other. So, setting aside the exception of baptized infants, grace and free choice are both required for one to be saved. The ways in which grace and free choice cooperate with each other, as well as the ways in which free choice fails to cooperate with grace, are complex. Four main features of this are: the relationship between uprightness or righteousness (rectitudo) and grace; the need for cooperation with grace through one’s will; Anselm’s threefold distinction about the will; and the will for happiness and the will for justice.

Uprightness of will was discussed at length in Anselm’s earlier works, but it receives a more sophisticated and nuanced treatment in the De Concordia. As before: “There is no doubt that the will only wills rightly [recte] when it is upright [recta]. . . the will is not upright because it wills rightly, but it wills rightly because it is upright.” (S., p. 265-6) When the will wills uprightness for its own sake, it quite clearly wills rightly, and as in the earlier works, the will thereby wills to remain in this uprightness. In the De Concordia treatment, however, it is possible for one to will more uprightness. “I do not deny that an upright will wills an uprightness it does not yet have, when it wills to have a greater uprightness than it has; but I say that no will can will uprightness, if it does not have the uprightness by which it wills it.” (S., p. 266)

Later, Anselm says something very similar:

It is said to those already converted [i.e. turned towards God, conservis]: “be converted,” either so that they are further converted or so that they keep themselves converted. For, those who say: “convert us, God,” are already in some way converted, since they have an upright will when they will to be converted. But they pray through what they have received so that their conversion be augmented, just like those who were believers and said: “increase our faith.” It is as if both of these groups said: “increase in us what you gave us, bring to fruition [perfice] what you began. (S., p. 272)

When one has uprightness, one can will to preserve it, but lacking it, one cannot simply will oneself to have it, and then thereby have it. In addition, a creature cannot have uprightness from itself, nor can it have it from another creature. Instead, it can only have it through God’s grace.

Grace, as Anselm states clearly, is not something simple to pin down. For one, there are many different ways in which grace is bestowed. As Anselm says, he is “not up to the task [non. . .valeam] – for it does this in many ways – of enumerating the ways in which, after this uprightness has been received, grace aids free choice to keep what it received.” (S., p. 267) For another, graces follow on graces, and this takes place in more than one way as well. For instance: “If the will, by free choice keeping what it received, merits either an augmentation of the justice it has received, or even the power for a good will, or some sort of reward, all of these are fruits of the first grace, and “grace for grace,” and therefore all of this is to be imputed to grace. . .” (S., p. 266-7)

Free choice can cooperate with grace, grace that is first given, that is to say, the giving of the uprightness that the will receives by free choice, and then, in keeping this righteousness, cooperates with grace again. The grace can only be lost by the choices made to abandon uprightness in favor of something else. Worthy of note, in this treatise, Anselm gives a concrete example of this sort of grace. “This uprightness is never separated from the will except when it wills something else that is not in harmony with this uprightness. Just as when somebody receives the uprightness of willing sobriety, and they reject it by wiling an immoderate pleasure of drinking. (S., p. 267)

In Anselm’s view, graces are offered in many ways, even at the moments when one is deciding. He give several examples of how grace assists the free choice of the will when one is tempted to abandon the uprightness one has received, “by mitigating or even entirely cancelling the force of the besieging temptation, or by augmenting the affection of that same uprightness.” (S., p. 268) Anselm supplies a principle of interpretation in these matters: “In short, since everything is subject to God’s ordination, whatever happens to a person that aids the free choice to receiving or keeping that uprightness of which I speak, is to be imputed entirely to grace.” (S., p. 268)

In his explanation of the extended metaphor of cultivation in Book 3, Chapter 6, Anselm provides further examples of grace, showing grace coming from grace and the involvement of free choice at each point. The metaphor is:

[J]ust as the earth, without any cultivation by humans, brings forth innumerable herbs and trees without which human nature is nourished or by which it is even destroyed, those that most necessary to us for nourishing life [are not brought forth] without great labor and cultivation, and not without seeds. Likewise the human hearth, without teaching, without application [studio] spontaneously germinates thoughts and willings [voluntates] that are of no use for salvation or are even harmful, whereas those, without which we make no progress to salvation of the soul, never conceive and germinate without a seed of their own sort and laborious cultivation. (S., p. 270)

Grace, the seed, involves, even requires human participation and effort, and at the same time aids the human effort at nearly every turn. Grace and human willing constantly interact.

That [preachers] are sent, is a grace. And for this reason, preaching is a grace, since what comes down from grace is grace; and hearing [the Word preached] is grace, and understanding what is heard is grace, and uprightness of wiling is grace. Truly sending, preaching, hearing, understanding are nothing unless the will wills what the mind understands. . . So, what the mind conceives from hearing the Word is the seed of preaching and uprightness is the “growth” [incrementum] that God gives, without which “neither he who plants nor he who waters is anything, but rather God who gives the growth.” (S., p. 271)

Anselm’s discussion of the will in the De Concordia revisits some of the same doctrines developed in earlier works. A person is not forced by temptation or oppression to abandon uprightness of will, but rather fails to will to keep it because he or she wills something else. What a person wills, they either will on account of uprightness or some benefit. These motives can, and in some cases do, clash with each other. There is a finer analysis of the will, one used later as the starting point in the De Moribus attributed to Anselm.

Since particular instruments have what they are [hoc quod sunt], and their aptitudes, and their uses, let us distinguish in the will that on account of which we call it an instrument, its aptitudes, and its uses. These aptitudes in the will we can call “affections,” since the instrument of willing is affected by its aptitudes.The will is spoken of equivocally, and in three ways. For, the instrument of willing is one thing, the affection of the instrument is another, and the use of this same instrument is yet another. The instrument of willing is that power [vis] of the soul that it uses for willing . . . The affection of this instrument is that by which this instrument itself is affected to willing something even when it does not think about what it wills . . . . The use of this very instrument is what we have only when we think about the thing that we will. (S., p. 280)

There is only one instrument of willing, and the instrument itself does not admit of degrees. There are many uses of the will, that is, actual willings in concrete situations, using the instrument of the will. There are multiple affections or aptitudes of the will, and they do admit of greater and lesser degrees. Anselm states that all of these can be regarded as different wills, since they are not identical (they are distinguishable without being separable). The distinction also allows clarification of the agency of the will: “The will as instrument moves all of the other instruments that we freely [sponte] use, both those that are part of us – like hand, tongue, sight – and those external to us – like pen, hatchet – and causes [facit] all of our voluntary motions. Indeed, it moves itself through its own affection, whence it can be called an instrument that moves its very self.” (S., p. 283-4)

Two affections are of particular importance, and allow clarification of how one deserts justice or uprightness of will. “From these two affections, which we still call ‘wills,’ all the merit of a person comes, whether good or bad. These two wills differ, however, because the one which is to willing benefit is inseparable, but the one for willing uprightness is separable.” (S., p. 284) This means that the will to benefit, which Anselm also calls “will to happiness” (uoluntas beatitudinis) is always part of the human being, whereas the will to justice is not. A person can will justice or uprightness (if they have it), in which case they do have it, or a person can not. It is by deserting justice, or by not willing the will to justice, in order to will something else, meaning happiness of such a sort that it is incompatible with justice, that the will as a whole, and a person as a whole goes astray. This then happens by the use of the person’s free choice.

13. The Fragments

Anselm left behind fragments of an unfinished work that is of some philosophical interest. Stylistically, they appear to have been intended to be a full dialogue, and the portions that we possess are written in polished Latin style. Their content consists in analyses of concepts and terminology central to certain parts of Anselm’s work, and although the theme of uncritical acceptance of ordinary linguistic usage obscuring the real matters at hand is not a new one, the analyses are carried out to a degree of sophistication unparalleled by the extant works. The student begins the dialogue: “There are many matters regarding which I have for some time wished your response, among which are ability [potestas] and inability [impotentia], possibility and impossibility, necessity and freedom. I enumerate all of these together at the same time, because the knowledge of them seems to me to be mixed up together.” (u.W, p. 23)

The student is led to several absurd conclusions in reasoning about these matters, which Anselm treated in earlier works, for example reconciling God being omnipotent with God being unable to do certain things, or it being impossible for God to do those things. The teacher indicates that what is needed is an understanding of the meaning of the verb “to do” (facere), and of what is, properly speaking (proprie) “one’s own” (suum alicuius). “To do” (later, Anselm will indicate that agere, “to act” does this as well) has an interesting and unique status, since it is used colloquially as substitute for many other expressions, even including those involving “not doing” (non facere). The expressions which it may substitute for can be the proper responses to the question: “what is he/she doing?”

The teacher then introduces several discussions about causes. “[E]verything of which any verb is said [i.e. any subject of which a verb is predicated], is some cause for what is signified by that verb being the case. And, every cause, in ordinary linguistic usage [usu loquendi] is said to “make” or do” [facere] what it is the cause of.” (u.W, p. 26) Some of these are straightforward, such as a person running causes that there is running. Some of these are not quite so straightforward. “For, in this way, one who sits, makes there to be sitting, and one who suffers, makes there to be suffering, because if the one who suffers were not to be, there would not be a suffering.” (u.W, p. 26) In addition, the being or nature of a thing is a cause for what can be said of it. “If, for example, we say: ‘(a) human being is an animal,’ (a) human being is a cause that there be an animal and that it be said that ‘there is animal.’ I do not mean that (a) human being is the cause for animal existing, but rather that (a) human being is the cause that it be and be called (an) animal. For by this name the entire human being is signified and conceived, in which whole animal is as a part.” (u.W, p. 27-8)

Next, the teacher notes that there are different ways (modis usus loquendi) of using the verb “to do,” “to make,” or “to cause” (facere), and although he concedes that their division is numerous and quite complicated (multiplex et nimis implicata), he advances a sixfold division of causing things to be or not to be.

Two ways, when:

  1. it causes what it is said to cause, or
  2. it does not cause what it is said to cause not to be

Four ways, when it causes or does not cause something else to be or not to be. For we say something to cause another thing to be, because. . . .

  1. it causes something else to be, or
  2. it does not cause something else to be, or
  3. because it causes something else not to be, or
  4. because it does not cause something else not to be. (u.W, p. 29)

He provides examples of each of these:

  1. . . . when somebody is said to cause another person to be dead by slaying him or her with a sword.
  2. The only example . . . I have is if I posit someone who could resuscitate a dead person, but does not will to do so. . . . In other matters, examples are abundant, as when we say that somebody causes an evil to be, one that, when he or she is able to, that somebody does not cause it not to be.
  3. . . . when it is asserted that someone killed another . . . because he or she ordered that the other be killed, or because he or she caused the killer to have a sword, or because he or she accused the one who was killed . . . . These people do not cause per se what is said to be caused . . . .but by doing something else . . . they act through an intermediary.
  4. . . .when we pronounce someone to have killed another, who did not provide arms to the one who was killed before he or she was killed, or who did not retrain the killer, or who did not do something that, had he or she done it, the person would not have been killed
  5. . . . by taking away the arms, one causes the one who is about to be killed to be disarmed, or by opening a door one causes the killer not to be closed up where he or she had been detained
  6. . . . when by not disarming the killer, one does not cause them not to be armed, or by not leading the one who would be killed away, so that they would not be in the killer’s presence. (u.W, p. 29-30)

The same six modes also hold for “to cause not to be” (facere non esse), and Anselm provides examples for them as well. In all but the first mode, the one who is supposed to cause something does not cause it directly. Likewise, the modes hold for “not to cause to be” (non facere esse) and “not to cause not to be” (non facere non esse). These tools for analysis, the teacher suggests, can be used for other verbs, for “is” (esse), and for “ought” or “owes” (debere), allowing restatement of the expressions in forms better signifying what is really meant by the expressions.

Willing, or “to will” (velle) presents an interesting set of conditions, for it parallels “to do” or “to cause.” “We say ‘to will’ in the same six modes as ‘to cause to be.’ Likewise, we say ‘to will not to be’ in all of the different ways as ‘to cause not to be.’” (u.W, p. 37) This expression can also be dealt with under a fourfold division. In the first, “efficient will” (efficiens), “we will in such a way that [ut], if we are able to, we cause to be what we will.” (u.W, p. 38) In another type of willing, “approving will” (approbans), “[w]e will something that we are able to cause to be but we do not cause to be, but still, if it happens, it pleases us, and we approve of it.” (u.W, p. 38) In yet another type of willing, “conceding will” (concedens), “we will something. . . like a creditor who, being indulgent, wills to accept from a debtor barley in place of the wheat [the debtor owes].” (u.W, p. 38) In the last kind, “someone is said to will what one neither approves nor concedes, but rather permits, when one could prohibit it.” (u.W, p. 38)

There is an order of implication to these wills as well:

[T]he one that I have called “e