Category Archives: History of Philosophy

Pierre Hadot (1922-2010)

Pierre HadotPierre Hadot, classical philosopher and historian of philosophy, is best known for his conception of ancient philosophy as a bios or way of life (manière de vivre). His work has been widely influential in classical studies and on thinkers, including Michel Foucault. According to Hadot, twentieth- and twenty-first-century academic philosophy has largely lost sight of its ancient origin in a set of spiritual practices that range from forms of dialogue, via species of meditative reflection, to theoretical contemplation.  These philosophical practices, as well as the philosophical discourses the different ancient schools developed in conjunction with them, aimed primarily to form, rather than only to inform, the philosophical student. The goal of the ancient philosophies, Hadot argued, was to cultivate a specific, constant attitude toward existence, by way of the rational comprehension of the nature of humanity and its place in the cosmos. This cultivation required, specifically, that students learn to combat their passions and the illusory evaluative beliefs instilled by their passions, habits, and upbringing. To cultivate philosophical discourse or writing without connection to such a transformed ethical comportment was, for the ancients, to be as a rhetorician or a sophist, not a philosopher. However, according to Hadot, with the advent of the Christian era and the eventual outlawing, in 529 C.E., of the ancient philosophical schools, philosophy conceived of as a bios largely disappeared from the West. Its spiritual practices were integrated into, and adapted by, forms of Christian monasticism. The philosophers’ dialectical techniques and metaphysical views were integrated into, and subordinated, first to revealed theology and then, later, to the modern natural sciences. However, Hadot maintained that the conception of philosophy as a bios has never completely disappeared from the West, resurfacing in Montaigne, Rousseau, Goethe, Thoreau, Nietzsche, and Schopenhauer, and even in the works of Descartes, Spinoza, Kant, and Heidegger.

Hadot’s conception of ancient philosophy and his historical narrative of its disappearance in the West have provoked both praise and criticism. Hadot received a host of letters from students around the world telling him that his works had changed their lives, perhaps the most fitting tribute given the nature of Hadot’s meta-philosophical claims. Unlike many of his European contemporaries, Hadot’s work is characterized by lucid, restrained prose; clarity of argument; the near-complete absence of recondite jargon; and a gentle, if sometimes self-depreciating, humor. While Hadot was an admirer of Nietzsche and Heidegger, and committed to a kind of philosophical recasting of the history of Western ideas, Hadot’s work lacks any eschatological sense of the end of philosophy, humanism, or the West. Late in life, Hadot would report that this was because he was animated by the sense that philosophy, as conceived and practiced in the ancient schools, remains possible for men and women of his era: “from 1970 on, I have felt very strongly that it was Epicureanism and Stoicism which could nourish the spiritual life of men and women of our times, as well as my own” (PWL 280).

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Philology and Method
  3. Early Work: Plotinus and the Simplicity of Vision
  4. What is Ancient Philosophy?
    1. Philosophical Discourse versus Philosophy
    2. Philosophy as a Way of Life
    3. The Figure of Socrates
    4. The Figure of the Sage
  5. Spiritual Practices
    1. Askesis of Desire
    2. Premeditation of Death and Evils
    3. Concentration on the Present Moment
    4. The View from Above
    5. Writing as Hypomnemata, and The Inner Citadel
  6. The Transformation of Philosophy after the Decline of Antiquity
    1. The Adoption of Spiritual Practices in Monasticism
    2. Philosophical Discourse as Handmaiden to Theology and the Natural Sciences
    3. The Permanence of the Ancient Conception of Philosophy
  7. References and Further Reading
    1. Works in French
    2. Works in English
    3. Selected Articles on Hadot

1. Biography

Pierre Hadot was born in Paris in 1922.  Educated as a Catholic, at age 22 Hadot began training for the priesthood. However, following Pope Pius XII's encyclical, Humani Generis, of 1950, Hadot left the priesthood, marrying for a first time in 1953. Between 1953 and 1962, Hadot studied the Latin patristics and was trained in philology. At this time, Hadot was also greatly interested in mysticism. In 1963, he published Plotinus: or The Simplicity of Vision, on the great Neoplatonic philosopher. During this period he also produced two of the first studies about Wittgenstein written in the French-language. Hadot was elected director of studies at the fifth section of the École Pratique des Hautes Études in 1964, and he married his is second wife, the historian of philosophy Ilsetraut Hadot, in 1966. From the mid-1960s, Hadot’s attention turned to wider studies in ancient thought, culminating in two key works: Exercices spirituels et philosophie antique, written in 1981 (translated into English in 1995 as Philosophy as a Way of Life [PWL] ) and Qu'est-ce que la philosophie antique?, written in 1995 (translated into English in 2002 as What is Ancient Philosophy? [WAP] ). Hadot was named professor at the Collège de France in 1982, where he held the chair for the History of Greek and Roman Thought (chaire d'histoire de la pensée hellénistique et romaine). Hadot retired from this position to become professeur honoraire at the Collège in 1991. He continued to translate, write, give interviews, and publish until shortly before his death in April 2010.

2. Philology and Method

Hadot would always insist that his groundbreaking work on ancient philosophy as a way of life arose from his early academic training as a philologist. Throughout his career, Hadot was involved in compiling, editing, and translating ancient Latin and Greek texts, including Marcus Aurelius’ Meditations, Ambrose of Milan’s Apology of David, Plotinus’ works, and as well as the theological works of the Roman rhetorician Marius Victorinus. The study of philology, Hadot claimed, was beneficial for him first of all as a kind of ethical exercise, engendering interpretive humility and attention to historical and textual detail. Secondly, it led him to raise the strictly literary problem concerning the way ancient philosophy was written. His reflections on this problem led Hadot to the meta-philosophical considerations concerning philosophy as a way of life seen in his mature work. Generally speaking, Hadot observed, “the philosophical works of Greco-Roman antiquity almost always perplex . . . contemporary readers . . . even . . . specialists in the field” (PWL 61). The reason is the apparently strange, disordered, circumlocutory, even incoherent nature of ancient philosophical writings, whether we consider Plato’s dialogues with their literary settings, myths or “likely stories”; the occasional letters of an Epicurus or a Seneca; Marcus Aurelius’ apparently desultory notes, injunctions, and aphorisms; or even Aristotle’s reputedly more “systematic” works, which are nevertheless often repetitious, punctuated by digressions, and sometimes inconclusive.

According to Hadot, these literary features seem odd only insofar as readers try, erroneously, to read ancient texts with presuppositions shaped by their reading of modern authors. Philosophical authors in the twenty-first century write under very different social, political, institutional, and technological constraints than their ancient antecedents.  In order to understand why the ancient philosophers wrote as they did, Hadot argued, readers need to cultivate a historical sense of “the concrete conditions in which they wrote, all the constraints that weighed upon them: the framework of the school, the very nature of philosophia, literary genres, rhetorical rules, dogmatic imperatives, and traditional modes of reasoning” (PWL 61). Readers must be prepared, in this light, to distinguish between what an author may have wanted to say, as against what he was required in his specific tradition and context to say, and what he was likewise obliged to pass over or leave unsaid” (PWL 64; PAH 64).

In different works, Hadot specified these constraints shaping the ancient philosophical texts. The ancient texts were dictated to scribes and intended to be read aloud. In general, ancient culture was one in which writing was still a relatively new phenomenon, set against the wider primacy of the spoken word—as reflected in the famous Platonic criticisms of writing. Ancient philosophy was largely carried out in the form of spoken dialogue between students and their teachers, so that—as Socrates had already insisted (4c)—students would be drawn to actively discover the truth on their own. Hadot suggests that by recognizing how these works retain and mirror the features of the spoken interchanges upon which they were modeled, modern readers can begin to understand many of the characteristic hesitations, starts and stops, repetitions, and digressions in ancient texts.

The oral bases of ancient philosophical teaching are again reflected in considerations concerning the addressees of these works. “Unlike their modern counterparts, none of these philosophical productions, even the systematic works, is addressed to everyone,” Hadot argued (PWL 64). The exceptions here are expressly exoteric texts like the Platonic dialogues, written with the “protreptic” purpose of attracting new students to philosophy, or like Aristotle’s practical writings, which are specifically addressed to potential statesmen or legislators (WAP 90). Otherwise, ancient philosophical writings were conceived within, and directed toward the members of, the philosophical schools. They reflect the philosophical subjects, techniques, and propositions developed in oral exercises, classes, and teachings, as well as the wider goals of philosophical paideia (4a).

In order to understand the form and intention of many ancient works, Hadot emphasized, the reader must understand the institutional frameworks of the ancient philosophical schools (the Platonic academy, the Aristotelian Lyceum, the Stoa, the Epicurean garden, and the later Platonist schools). Aristotle’s extant works, which were lecture notes seemingly compiled by students or a later redactor within the Lyceum, are only the most obvious case. Part of the curricula in Platonic and Stoic schools, Hadot emphasized, were formalized exercises in dialectics: discussing, through questions and answers, particular theses (such as, “virtue can be taught”) in a way which goes toward explaining the preeminence of the dialogue form in ancient philosophical writing. Even the later, more systematic forms of philosophical treatise that emerged within Platonism in particular, Hadot claimed, must be understood “from the perspective of dialectical and exegetical scholarly exercises” as attempts to synthesize and order the whole of doctrine which had emerged with the school (PWL 63-4). Again, particularly in the imperial period of late antiquity, a large amount of ancient philosophical writings and teaching began to study commentary rather than the original works of  the different schools. This was a literary genre in which great weight was given to arguments from authority, in a way that anticipated the medieval scholastics.  Different philosophical traditions developed particular stylistic features, such as characteristic images, turns of phrase, or highly formulaic dogmata, which later exegetes were more or less compelled to use, “independent, if one may say so, of the author’s will” (PWL 62).

Hadot’s work in philology, and his sensitivity to the institutional and traditional constraints shaping ancient works, gave rise in his thought to an acute sense of the role played in the history of thought by misappropriations, mistranslations, and creative mistakes.  The high status afforded in later classical thought to formulae, images, phrases, and patterns of argument in the schools’ founding texts saw many instances of these philosophical formulae (like “know thyself” or “nature loves to hide”) being borrowed, misappropriated, and given new meaning in the texts of different philosophical traditions, and in the encounter between Hellenistic paganism and Jewish and Christian monotheisms. Later exegetes’ determination to systematize earlier texts and to render them wholly consistent in the light of accepted understandings, together with the supposition that earlier masters could neither be mistaken nor contradict themselves, led to problematic or arbitrary systematizations which nevertheless underlay important evolutions in the history of ideas. Hadot adduces in this context the four- or five-tiered Neoplatonic ontological hierarchies drawn from Plato’s dialogues and Augustine’s positing of a “heaven of heavens” on the basis of a Greek mistranslation of Psalm 113:16. Hadot devoted an early essay to showing how the entire Neoplatonic interpretation of the Parmenides, a subject of great later importance, rested on Porphyry’s erroneous introduction of a distinction between “being” (Gr. ousia) as an infinitive (Fr. être) and as a participle (Fr: étant) to explain the “pure transcendental act” (étant) of the One Beyond Being (être).

3. Early Work: Plotinus and the Simplicity of Vision

Hadot’s first book, Plotinus, or the Simplicity of Vision, was published in 1963. It shows the first fruits of his philological training over the previous decade and his distinct perspective upon ancient philosophical writings. The book was commissioned as a title in a series of works on the lives, or psychobiographies, of famous authors. Hadot begins by underlining the difficulties associated with trying to write a biography of a thinker about whose life we have little testimony (PSV 77-78), who blushed even at having his portrait made, and whose entire philosophy was devoted to the transcendence of his mundane, bodily self —as a sculptor transforms the stone upon which he works (PSV 21; Enneads I.6, 9). Hadot also urges caution, as he will later in his writings on Aurelius (5a) in trying to infer any biographical or psychological insight concerning the author from a work like PlotinusEnneads, whose modes of arguing, and many of whose images and figures of speech, “are not spontaneous: [but] traditional and imposed by the texts to be commented upon” in the Platonic heritage of which Plotinus was a legatee (PSV 17).

With that said, Plotinus, or the Simplicity of Vision (PSV) importantly anticipates many of Hadot’s later arguments on ancient philosophy.  Hadot tells us in the autobiographical interviews of The Present Alone is Our Happiness that as a young man, he had undergone some kind of mystical experience (PAH 5-6). This was an experience that shaped Hadot’s own initial scholarly research, including several of the first French-language articles on Wittgenstein’s philosophy, and his continuing interest in “unitary experience.” It can, arguably, be seen to underlie Hadot’s repeated, central claim that the classical philosophies were rooted in certain paradigmatic experiences of existence (4b). In any case, Hadot argues in PSV that the famous Neoplatonic metaphysics of the One, the Ideas, and the world-psyche is not the abstract, purely theoretical, otherworldly construction it is often presented as being. Rather, Hadot claims, in Plotinus’ Enneads the language of metaphysics “is used to express an inner experience. All these levels of reality become levels of inner life, levels of the self” (PSV 27).  For Hadot, Plotinus’ metaphysical discourse is animated by a “fundamental but inexpressible experience.” This is what gives his work a “unique, incomparable, and irreplaceable tonality” despite Plotinus’ open and avowed citation of inherited Platonic tropes and arguments (PSV 19). For Hadot, Plotinus’ system revolves around the core, existential claim that the human self is not irrevocably separated from its eternal model, the transcendent One or Good. Indeed, at the height of the philosopher’s contemplative ascent, we are called to supra-intellectual identity with this Good: “We then become this eternal self, we are moved by unutterable beauty . . . we identify ourselves with divine Thought itself” (PSV 27). The only autobiographical passage in the Enneads, Hadot notes, involves Plotinus’ testimony about this mystical union (“I become One with the divine, and I establish myself in it” (Enneads IV 8, 1 4), whose content is such that the philosopher is drawn to wonder “how is it possible that I should come down now, and how was it ever possible for my soul to come to be within my body . . .” (Enneads IV 8, 1, 8-9; PSV 25).

In Hadot’s later writings, Plotinus’ philosophical discourse cannot be separated from, but is rather rooted in, the spiritual biography of the philosopher himself. Indeed, PSV already stresses the way that in classical antiquity, certainly in the imperial era of Plotinus, philosophy involved the call to a transformation of individuals’ way of living: a “conversion of attention,” away from “vain preoccupations and exaggerated worries” (PSV 30-31). The philosophical master like Plotinus, in this setting, was less a professor or teacher in modes we would recognize, than a spiritual guide. In Hadot’s words: “he exhorted his charges to conversion, and then directed his new converts . . . . to the paths of wisdom. He was a spiritual advisor” (PSV 75-6). Nevertheless, Porphyry reports that even Plotinus himself was able to achieve mystical union with the One, or Good, only four times in the six years Porphyry was at the master’s school in Rome. The philosopher can at most prepare himself and his charges for such ultimately passive, or receptive, experiences of unity with the Good (compare PSV 55-56). The means to prepare oneself was through the practice of spiritual exercises such as dietary (and other) forms of ascesis (PSV 82) and regular contemplative practices. More than this, PSV situates Plotinus’ later preoccupation with ethical concerns, and cultivating the virtues of benevolence, gentleness, simplicity, and respect for others as part of a kind of ever-renewed effort of the philosopher, between his transitory, mystical experiences, to remain mindful of the higher Good he has contemplatively glimpsed (PSV 65, 86).

For all of Hadot’s evident enthusiasm for Plotinus’ philosophy, however, PSV concludes with an assessment of the modern world’s inescapable distance from Plotinus’ thought and experience. Hadot distances himself from Plotinus' negative assessment of bodily existence, and he also displays a caution in his support for mysticism, citing the skeptical claims of Marxism and psychoanalysis about professed mysticism, considering it a lived mystification or obfuscation of truth (PSV 112-113). Hadot would later recall that, after writing the book in a month and returning to ordinary life, he had his own uncanny experience: “. . . seeing the ordinary folks all around me in the bakery, I  . . .  had the impression of having lived a month in another world, completely foreign to our world, and worse than this—totally unreal and even unlivable.” Hadot’s work after 1965 increasingly turned away from Neoplatonism, in particular, and the phenomena of mysticism, in general, and to studies of the divergent ancient philosophical schools, especially those of the Hellenistic and Roman, or imperial, eras.

4. What is Ancient Philosophy?

a. Philosophical Discourse versus Philosophy

Hadot often stressed that his conception of philosophy as a way of life, long before this idea became fashionable, emerged out of the scholarly attempt to understand the unusual literary forms of ancient philosophical writing (see 2). Hadot emphasized that he in no way denied or wanted to downplay “the extraordinary ability of the ancient philosophers to develop theoretical reflection on the most subtle problems of the theory of knowledge, logic, or physics.” Nevertheless, if modern readers are to understand how this theoretical reflection is conveyed in extant ancient writings, Hadot argued that readers are compelled to adopt a perspective “different from that which corresponds to the idea people usually have of philosophy” (WAP 3).

According to Hadot’s position as developed in What is Ancient Philosophy?, philosophical discourse must in particular be situated within a wider conception of philosophy that sees philosophy as necessarily involving a kind of existential choice or commitment to a specific way of living one’s entire life. According to Hadot, one became an ancient Platonist, Aristotelian, or Stoic in a manner more comparable to the twenty-first century understanding of religious conversion, rather than the way an undergraduate or graduate student chooses to accept and promote, for example, the theoretical perspectives of Nietzsche, Badiou, Davidson, or Quine. Hadot cites as a particularly striking instance the case of Polemo, later head of the Academy, who decided then and there to adopt the Platonic philosophical bios after being dared by friends to listen to a lecture of Xenocrates after a night of drunken debauchery (WAP 98).What was involved in such cases was not solely the student’s intellectual assent to an intellectual doctrine or “-ism” in more or less complete isolation from the student’s wider life. Rather, one feature of philosophical writings across different schools was a sometimes caustic criticism of men who professed some teaching or refined way of speaking “ . . . but contradict themselves in the conduct of their own lives.” As Hadot writes in WAP, “According to the Stoic Epictetus, [such people] talk about the art of living like human beings, instead of living like human beings themselves . . . as Seneca put it, they turn true love of wisdom (philosophia) into love of words (philologia).” Traditionally, people who developed an apparently philosophical discourse without trying to live their lives in accordance with their discourse, and without their discourse emanating from their life experience, were called sophists (WAP 174).

Hadot argues in this light that ancient philosophical writings must always be situated in relation to the existential choice of a certain mode of living that characterizes the different ancient philosophies (4b; WAP 3). This need can be seen clearly enough by considering the different genres, or language games, of ancient philosophical writings, and noting specifically that these included letters addressed to individual students’ concerns (Seneca, Epicurus); meditations, or hypomnemata (memory aids), addressed by the student to himself (as in the case of Marcus Aurelius) (5a); consolations against loss and hardships (Boethius, Seneca); studies devoted to mundane stations in life (Of Marriage [Cleanthes], On Leisure [Seneca]); biographies of philosophers (Xenephon, Diogenes Laertius); and works enjoining particular practical conduct (Of Just Dealings [Epicurus], How to Live Amongst Men [Diogenes]). But in WAP, Hadot specifies a series of particular ways philosophical writings relate to ancient philosophy, conceived of as some specific choice of a manière de vivre. First, philosophical discourse aims to do specific things with words, concerning those who will read them. Philosophical discourse, in Hadot’s words, “is a privileged means by which the philosopher can act upon himself and others: for if it is the expression of the existential option of the person who utters it, discourse always has, directly or indirectly, a function which is formative, educative, psychagogic, and therapeutic” (WAP 176). Hadot sometimes cites in this connection Epicurus’ justification for his pursuit of theoretical physics: to reassure mortals against fear concerning death and our imaginings of active, interventionist gods. But here also Hadot’s stress (see 2) on the spoken, dialogic foundation and model for many ancient writings applies. As when we speak directly to a particular individual, so ancient philosophical discourse “is always intended to produce an effect, a habitus within the soul, or to provoke a transformation of the self” of its addressee. (loc cit.)  Secondly, in a way closer to how philosophy tends to be conceived of today, philosophical discourse involved the construction of more or less formalized systems—but this was in order to explain and justify the different schools’ different conceptions of the good life. Whichever philosophical school’s conception of the good life  is chosen, Hadot explains, “it will be necessary to disengage the presuppositions, implications, and consequences of each attitude with great precision” (WAP 175). It was on this primarily practical basis that the different ancient schools each developed their own technical languages, metaphysical conceptions of humanity’s place within the cosmos, ethical teachings defining one’s relationship to others, and epistemological doctrines about the rules of correct reasoning and argument (WAP 176). Characteristically, Hadot stresses that even the later exegetical systematizations, treatises, and dense summaries of doctrine that emerged in later antiquity were related to the exigencies associated with trying to form students who lived in a certain manner. For this to be possible, students (prokopta) would need to be able at any time to call to mind the school’s key precepts, in particular when they faced temptations or difficulties in their lives. Such a timely recollection of the rules of life was facilitated by having these systematizations and summaries available as written hypomnemata (WAP 176-7).

b. Philosophy as a Way of Life

Hadot’s founding meta-philosophical claim is that since the time of Socrates, in ancient philosophy “the choice of a way of life [was] not . . . located at the end of the process of philosophical activity, like a kind of accessory or appendix. On the contrary, its stands at the beginning, in a complex interrelationship with critical reaction to other existential attitudes . . .” (WAP 3). All the schools agreed that philosophy involves the individual’s love of and search for wisdom. All also agreed, although in different terms, that this wisdom involved “first and foremost . . . a state of perfect peace of mind,” as well as a comprehensive view of the nature of the whole and humanity’s place within it. They concurred that attaining to such Sophia, or wisdom, was the highest Good for human beings. All ancient philosophical schools agreed that, by contrast, most people live unwise lives most of the time. These lives are characterized by unnecessary forms of suffering and disorder, caused by their ignorance or unconsciousness concerning the true source of human happiness. In the view of all philosophical schools, Hadot claims that “mankind’s principal cause of suffering, disorder and unconsciousness were the passions: that is, unregulated desires and exaggerated fears. People are prevented from truly living, it was taught, because they are dominated by the passions” (PWL 83). Political society in all but the best regimes, while natural to human beings, was agreed to be a further cause of individuals’ having deeply habituated, false beliefs concerning human nature and concerning what is good for them to pursue and to avoid. Ancient philosophers thus conceived of philosophy as involving a therapy of the soul, or “remedy for human worries, anguish, and misery brought about for the Cynics, by social constraints and conventions; for the Epicureans, by the quest for false pleasures; for the Stoics, by the pursuit of pleasure and egoistic self-interest; and for the skeptics, by false opinions” (WAP 102).

The disagreements between the ancient philosophies concerned the way the happiness of wisdom was to be conceived of and pursued. For Epicureanism, wisdom involved the pursuit of a particular species of pleasure; whereas for Platonism, Aristotelianism, and Stoicism, some conception of virtue or the Good was prioritized as the one necessary element. But the Platonic conception of this Good, of course, differs markedly from the Peripatetic and Stoic ideals. Each philosophical perspective, Hadot moreover claims, responded to a different, specific experience of the world: as in Epicureanism, “the voice of the flesh: ‘not to be hungry, not to be thirsty, not to be cold’ ” (WAP 115); or in Stoicism, the sense expressed by Epictetus that people are unhappy because they passionately seek things which they cannot obtain and flee evils which are inevitable (WAP 127). Then there are the disagreements between the ancient schools concerning the place and role of intellectual contemplation, and the elaboration of theoretical dogmata, in pursuing the good life. These range from the Aristotelian approach, which seeks out what Aristotle, in the opening pages of The Parts of Animals, calls the “incredible pleasure” (645a7) of investigating and contemplating all the works of nature as an end in itself; to the skeptics’ position, which sought eudaimonia (happiness, or welfare) through suspending judgment altogether; to the Cynics, “for whom philosophical discourse was reduced to a minimum—sometimes to mere gestures” (WAP 83, 173). Nevertheless, Hadot more typically stresses the commonalities between the ancient philosophical schools and conceptions of philosophy, insofar as each involved “… a complete reversal of received ideas: one was to renounce the false values of wealth, honors, and pleasures, and turn towards the true value of virtue, contemplation, a simple life-style, and the simple happiness of existing”. This radical opposition explains the reaction of nonphilosophers, which ranged from the mockery we find expressed in the comic poets, to the outright hostility that led to the death of Socrates (PWL 104).

c. The Figure of Socrates

It was with the figure of Socrates that ancient philosophy distinguished itself from its ancient precedents: the rhetorical education of the sophists, the discourses of the pre-Socratic physikoi and historians, the sayings and lives of the seven sages, and the aristocratic concern with the paideia, or upbringing, of young men (WAP 9-21). Socrates inspired nearly all subsequent ancient philosophic schools, either directly, through students like Plato, Xenophon, Aristippus, Euclides, and Antisthenes, or indirectly, via the writings of Plato in particular, as a kind of ethical ideal in the Stoic school, and as a mythical, Silenic figure central to the entirety of subsequent Western intellectual life. In Philosophy as a Way of Life, Hadot devotes an entire chapter of WAP to “the figure of Socrates,” as well as a long, beautiful essay exploring Socrates’ atopia (enigmatic nature) and the extraordinary responses his life has inspired, focusing particularly on Kierkegaard and Nietzsche. Hadot’s Socrates anticipates and sets the mold for all the ancient philosophies as ways of life. First, Socrates associated the philosophic life with a revaluation of accepted normative commitments of his society and with a studied indifference toward the things his contemporaries coveted (wealth, status, property, public office, political disputes), as attested by his appearance, dress, and absence of gainful employment (compare Apo. 36b). Second, as Plato’s Alcibiades famously attests in the Symposium, Socrates overturned accepted, inherited models of wisdom, in his discourse as much as in his person, as well as through his repeated ironic claims, that he lacked any kind of higher wisdom, saying that he was only a midwife for the ideas of others, or was like a gadfly stirring his fellows from ethical complacency. He is identified in Plato’s Symposium with the daimonic Eros, mediating between human beings and the gods, but not for that reason divine himself (PWL 158-165).Third, Hadot’s Socrates is the first, unsurpassable practitioner of philosophic dialogue conceived of as what Hadot calls a “spiritual exercise” (compare 5) designed to actively implicate the other in the Socratic process of doubting received opinions and seeking to render one’s own beliefs consistent. For Hadot, “in the Socratic dialogue, the real question is less what is being talked about than who is doing the talking,” as Nikias attests in the Laches, when the latter notes that whichever topic Socrates’ interlocutor may raise, “he will continually be carried round and round by him, until at last he finds that he has to give an account both of his present and past life” (Laches 197e; WAP 28; PWL 155). Fourth, Hadot notes that when Socrates does attest to having some kinds of knowledge, in the famous Socratic paradoxes—that no one does evil voluntarily, that it is better to suffer than to do wrong, and that the good man cannot be harmed—this knowledge is of a specifically ethical kind, concerning how to live, and what is good or bad for the psyche: “Socrates does not know the value to be attributed to death, because it is not in his power . . . Yet he does know the value of moral action and intention, for they do depend on his choice, his decision, and his engagement . . .” (WAP 83, 84). In other words, in Hadot’s Socrates, care for the self and care for others coincided with Socrates’ sense of what Hadot calls “the absolute value of moral intent: a philosophical commitment embodied in Socrates’ dialogical calling, “to try to persuade all of you to concern yourself less about what he has than about what he is . . .” (Apo. 36c). Above all, Hadot stresses that throughout antiquity Socrates was the model of the philosopher whose work was, above all, his own life, death, and example: “He was the first to show that at all times and all places, in everything that happens to us, daily life gives the opportunity to do philosophy” (Plutarch, at WAP 38).

d. The Figure of the Sage

A further, too-often neglected feature of the ancient conception on philosophy as a way of life, Hadot argues, was a set of discourses aiming to describe the figure of the Sage. The Sage was the living embodiment of wisdom, “the highest activity human beings can engage in . . . which is linked intimately to the excellence and virtue of the soul” (WAP 220). Across the schools, Socrates himself was agreed to have been perhaps the only living exemplification of such a figure (his avowed agnoia notwithstanding). Pyrrho and Epicurus were also accorded this elevated status in their respective schools, just as Sextius and Cato were deemed sages by Seneca, and Plotinus by Porphyry. Yet more important than documenting the lives of historical philosophers (although this was another ancient literary genre) was the idea of the Sage as “transcendent norm.” The aim, by picturing such figures, was to give “an idealized description of the specifics of the way of life” that was characteristic of the each of the different schools (WAP 224). The philosophical Sage, in all the ancient discourses, is characterized by a constant inner state of happiness or serenity. This has been achieved through minimizing his bodily and other needs, and thus attaining to the most complete independence (autarcheia) vis-à-vis external things. The Sage is for this reason capable of maintaining virtuous resolve and clarity of judgment in the face of the most overwhelming threats, from natural catastrophes to “the fury of citizens who ordain evil . . . [or] the face of a threatening tyrant” (Horace in WAP 223). In the different ancient schools, these characteristics differentiating the Sage from nonphilosophers mean that this figure “tends to become very close to God or the gods,” as conceived by the philosophers. The Epicurean gods, like the God of Aristotle, Hadot notes, are characterized by their perfect serenity and exemption from all troubles and dangers. Epicurus calls the Sage the friend of the gods, and the gods friends of the Sages. Aristotle equates the contemplation of the wise man with the self-contemplation of the unmoved mover. Platonic philosophy sees ascent in wisdom as progressive assimilation to the divine (WAP 226-7). Hadot goes as far as to suggest that Plotinus and other ancient philosophers “project” the figure of the God, on the basis of their conception of the figure of the Sage, as a kind of model of human and intellectual perfection” (WAP 227-8). However, Hadot stresses that the divine freedom of the Sage from the concerns of ordinary human beings does not mean the Sage lacks all concern for the things that preoccupy other human beings. Indeed, in a series of remarkable analyses, Hadot argues that this indifference towards external goods (money, fame, property, office . . . ) opens the Sage to a different, elevated state of awareness in which he “never ceases to have the whole present in his mind, never forgets the world, thinks and acts in relation to the cosmos . . . ” (Bernhard Groethuysen in WAP 229). The Stoic Sage who has realized that external things do not depend upon his will, for instance, is prompted to accept these “indifferents” with equal benevolence or equanimity (the famous amor fati, or love of fate, later adopted by Nietzsche). In “The Sage and the World,” Hadot analyzes the peculiar phenomenology of this “detached, disinterested consciousness” in Lucretius and Seneca, aligning their thoughts with modern discourse on aesthetic perception, Rousseau’s famous “sensation of existence,” and Bergson’s conception of philosophical perception (PWL 253-6). The perception of the Sage constantly views things with the wonder of seeing the world for the first time (PWL 257-8), or as others see things only when a sense of their mortality, and therefore the unique singularity of each moment and experience, is imposed upon them (PWL 260).

5. Spiritual Practices

a. Askesis of Desire

For Hadot, famously, the means for the philosophical student to achieve the “complete reversal of our usual ways of looking at things” epitomized by the Sage were a series of spiritual exercises. These exercises encompassed all of those practices still associated with philosophical teaching and study: reading, listening, dialogue, inquiry, and research. However, they also included practices deliberately aimed at addressing the student’s larger way of life, and demanding daily or continuous repetition: practices of attention (prosoche), meditations (meletai), memorizations of dogmata, self-mastery (enkrateia), the therapy of the passions, the remembrance of good things, the accomplishment of duties, and the cultivation of indifference towards indifferent things (PWL 84). Hadot acknowledges his use of the term “spiritual exercises” may create anxieties, by associating philosophical practices more closely with religious devotion than typically done (Nussbaum 1996, 353-4; Cooper 2010). Hadot’s use of the adjective “spiritual” (or sometimes “existential”) indeed aims to capture how these practices, like devotional practices in the religious traditions (6a), are aimed at generating and reactivating a constant way of living and perceiving in prokopta, despite the distractions, temptations, and difficulties of life. For this reason, they call upon far more than “reason alone.” They also utilize rhetoric and imagination in order “to formulate the rule of life to ourselves in the most striking and concrete way” and aim to actively re-habituate bodily passions, impulses, and desires (as for instance, in Cynic or Stoic practices, abstinence is used to accustom followers to bear cold, heat, hunger, and other privations) (PWL 85). These practices were used in the ancient schools in the context of specific forms of interpersonal relationships: for example, the relationship between the student and a master, whose role it was to guide and assist the student in the examination of conscience, in identification and rectification of erroneous judgments and bad actions, and in the conduct of dialectical exchanges on established themes.

b. Premeditation of Death and Evils

Perhaps the most well-known philosophical spiritual exercise is the Stoic practice of the premeditation of evils. In this exercise, the students are exhorted to present to their minds, in advance, the possible evils that may befall them in the course of their upcoming endeavors, so as to limit the force of their possible fear, anger, or sadness, should these evils occur. Galen recommends that at the beginning of each day individuals try to call to mind all they have to do in the course of the day ahead, envisaging the ways things may go awry, and recalling the principles that should guide them in their actions; Marcus, similarly, enjoins himself to anticipate each day that he will encounter envious, ungrateful, overbearing, treacherous, and selfish men (Med. II.1) Plato’s Socrates, in the Phaedo, famously comforts his friends by suggesting that philosophy is learning how to die. Taking this Platonic statement as emblematic of a wider philosophical exercise, Hadot stresses that repeated meditation upon one’s mortality, and the possible immanence of one’s death, was a spiritual exercise practiced across the philosophical schools. This exercise was not an exercise in morbidity or life-denial, so much as a means to focus the philosopher’s attention on the “infinite value” of each instant and action in  life (5c). In Stoic texts, we read injunctions to “hurry up and live” (Seneca, at WAP 194). Horace’s famous carpe diem from the Odes in like manner reminds us that “Life ebbs as I speak: so seize each day, and grant the next no credit” (PWL 88). As in “practical physics” (5d), meditating upon one’s mortality in such exercises is also prescribed as a way of dying to one’s individuality and passions, so the philosopher learns to look at things from the perspective of universality or objectivity.

c. Concentration on the Present Moment

Constant, renewed attention to the present moment, Hadot argues, “ . . . is, in a sense, the key to spiritual exercises” (PWL 84). The philosophical attempt to focus our attention on present concerns answers to the ontological observation that “we live in the present, so infinitely small. The rest either has been lived, or else it [the future] is uncertain” (Aurelius Med. VII, 54). It also reflects the observation that the pressing, immediate demands of one’s upsetting passions are all responses to concerns about the future (that some feared state will transpire, or some desired state may not) or to concerns about past actions (guilt, shame, or anxiety about how others have perceived one’s words or actions). Yet all that one can ever change or achieve is what is occurring in the present moment, which is the site of all decision, action, and freedom. It would follow that these pathe, or their immediate demands, are tangentially irrational. This is the thought that underlies both the Epicurean prayers of gratitude that nature has made necessary things easy to attain and difficult things easy to bear, and the Stoic teachings concerning the irrationality of the pathē. We must learn to calm our passions so we can clearly assess what is happening to us at any given moment, rectify our present intentions, and accept with equanimity all that is occurring which does not depend upon our volition. The larger aim is that the philosopher learns to separate the self (or in the Stoics, the ruling principle) from all unnecessary attachments to alienable, external goods, so that a sense of joy and gratitude can be experienced independent of whichever situations fate has delivered. As Hadot notes, the Epicurean and Stoic meditations concerning how death is nothing for “us” (since when it is here, “we” are not, and vice-versa) belong here: these meditations are a means to conquer worries about this inevitable future event (WAP 197-8). 

d. The View from Above

We saw in 4b how Hadot situates even Aristotle’s apparently purely theoretical endeavors in the context of a choice of bios, one which aims to deliver to the inquirer the great pleasure that attends even the study of physical nature, “for there is something wonderful in all of the works of Nature” (Aristotle at WAP 83). Similarly, Hadot notes, the Epicurean elaboration of a physical philosophy of atoms, an infinite universe, and a plurality of worlds was pursued and recommended by Epicurus as a means to overcome unnecessary fear of death and interventionist gods. The Stoics not only maintained the distinction Hadot generalizes to all ancient philosophy, between philosophy as a way of life and philosophical discourse. Hadot argues that thinkers in this school also maintained that there were “lived” practices of logic, involving the constant examination of one’s practical reasoning and forms of what he terms “practical physics” (WAP 172; PWL 242). Practical physics involved the philosopher’s activity of vigilantly monitoring all his beliefs concerning what he encounters. One practice here was that of dispassionately, analytically dividing enticing or threatening appearances into their matter, form, and parts. In this way, their potentially overpowering impression upon us is combated, as in Marcus’ famous description of sex as “the rubbing together of pieces of gut, followed by the spasmodic secretion of a little bit of slime” (PWL 185). Hadot devotes an entire essay in PWL to the practice of the “view from above,” which he argues was practiced across all of the ancient schools. In this exercise, the students are encouraged to reconsider how small, or ant-like, their lives and actions appear from an enlarged, or cosmic, perspective (the famous perspective sub specie eternis), so as to combat the erroneous significance our self-interest and passions prompt us to assign to particular episodes. In Cicero, as in Boethius (Consolations II 7), for example, the philosopher’s consideration of how his fate is as a tiny speck given the magnitude of the world or of space makes him see the irrationality of the pursuit of fame. Seneca recommends the same exercise to show the folly of pursuing luxuries and of nations’ constant warring (WAP 206-7). The positive side to the exercise is to again engender in students the kind of wonder, serenity, or elevation of spirit, imputed to the perspective of the Sage. In The Veil of Isis, Hadot’s late work on the history of Western conceptions of the natural world, Hadot aligns the attitude engendered by this view from above with the “Orphic” attitude to revealing nature’s secrets through poetry, art, and discourse (VI 155-32).  This attitude, pursued in modern philosophy under the rubric of aesthetic perception, is opposed to the “Promethean,” technological attempt to tame nature that is prominent in Baconian science.(VI 101-154).

e. Writing as Hypomnemata, and The Inner Citadel

Hadot’s treatment of Marcus Aurelius’ Ta Eis Eauton (or “Meditations”) in his long essay in PWL, and in the book The Inner Citadel, serves well to bring together both the methodological concerns governing Hadot’s readings of classical thought and this conception of ancient philosophy as revolving around a series of spiritual exercises. The text as we have it is divided into 473 fragments in twelve books, and for all its flashes of limpid beauty, it can seem completely disordered to the modern reader. It has provoked a host of interpretations over time, down to speculations concerning Marcus’ melancholia, stomach ulcer, or morphine addiction. The whole seems to develop no argument and often to repeat itself. The emperor-philosopher mixes genres, or language games, from aphorisms, via staged dialogues and injunctions addressed to himself, to citations from poets and other philosophers, to more extended enthymemes. For Hadot, these formal peculiarities of Marcus’ text dissolve when we situate the text itself as the exemplar of a type of spiritual exercise recommended in the Stoic heritage to which Marcus belonged: namely, as a hypomnemata the philosopher was enjoined to keep always at hand (procheiron), whose production and rereading was recommended as a means for to keep alive at all times the key Stoic principles (kephalaia), independent of whether anyone else should read them. In this perspective, as Hadot concludes The Inner Citadel, the repetitions, the multiple developments of the same theme, and the stylistic effort in the Meditations attest not to any conceptual laziness or other morbidity, rather they suggest “the efforts of a man . . . trying to do what, in the last analysis, we are all trying to do: to live in complete consciousness and lucidity, to give to each of our instants its full intensity, and to give meaning to our entire life” (IC, 312-313).

6. The Transformation of Philosophy after the Decline of Antiquity

a. The Adoption of Spiritual Practices in Monasticism

Hadot disputes the notion of a simple, radical break between Greek philosophy and Judeo-Christian monotheism. Hadot notes that, in the first centuries of the Christian era, educated Christian apologists such as Clement of Alexander, Basil of Caesarea, Origen, Justin, and the other Cappadocian fathers identified Christianity as the true, non-Greek, or “barbarian,” philosophia, much as Philo of Alexandria had presented Judaism as patrios philosophia—the traditional philosophy of the Jewish people (PWL 128-9). Here, Hadot’s attention to the creative role of exegetical errors in the history of ideas applies (see 2). For above all, the Greek word Logos was central to Greek philosophy since Heraclitus, but it was also used by Saint John in the opening verses of the fourth gospel, making possible this conception of Christianity as philosophy (WAP 218-9; PWL 128). Saint John maintained that anticipatory aspects or elements of the true Logos had been dispersed amongst the Greeks. Christians were in possession of the revealed Logos itself in the incarnate Christ. Christianity’s conception as a way of living also positioned it well to appropriate the spiritual exercises developed in the philosophical schools, integrating them into the different “style of life, spiritual attitude and tonality” of Christian life (PWL 129; 139). From the fourth century C. E., monasticism as the perfection of Christian life, in a life withdrawn from ordinary society and devoted to meditation and prayer, adopted what a Cistercian text calls “the disciplines of celestial philosophy” (PWL 129): prosoche or attention to oneself and one’s thoughts, askeseis of the passions, detachment or aprospatheia from worldly concerns, meditation upon key rules of life, the attempt to live each day as if it were one’s last, the practice of writing as hypomnema; all now refigured as the attempt to live in constant remembrance of god. (PWL 129-135)  Particularly interesting from a scholarly perspective are Hadot’s observations of the efforts made by Christian authors to ground these practices in biblical exegesis, as for instance in tying philosophical prosoche to biblical text: “Give heed to yourself, lest there be a hidden word in your heart” (Deuteronomy); Above all else, guard your heart” (Proverbs 4:23); “Examine yourself . . . and test yourselves” (Second Corinthians 13:5); and even the Song of Songs’ “If you do not know yourself, O most beautiful of women . . .” (WAP 248-9; 242; WAP 130).  

b. Philosophical Discourse as Handmaiden to Theology and the Natural Sciences

As Hadot notes, another component of the apologists’ attempt to present Christianity in forms congenial to Greco-Roman culture was the attempt to reinterpret elements of Greek philosophical discourse, for instance, the theological passages of the Timaeus, as anticipating revealed doctrine. In another way, the Christian authors would interpret revealed notions in terms redolent of philosophical discourse, as when Evagrius defines “the Kingdom of heaven” as “apatheia of the soul along with true knowledge of existing things” (PWL 136), or in Origen’s recommendation to students to read the Book of Proverbs, Ecclesiastes, and the Song of Songs, as corresponding respectively to philosophical ethics, physics, and theology (WAP 239-240). With the growing cultural ascendancy of revealed Christianity, however, particularly after the closure of the philosophical schools, Hadot argues that philosophy as a way of life was largely eclipsed. Philosophical discourse, for its part, was subordinated within the Christian orbit to the higher wisdom of the Word of God as revealed in the Bible. Elements of Aristotelian logic and ontology, as they had been integrated into the Neoplatonism of the imperial era, were adapted in the Church’s attempts to stabilize the Trinitarian God. Differently, Church fathers like Origen and Clement of Alexandria adopted Philo’s earlier claim that philosophical studies must be conceived as the propaedeutic to the wisdom revealed in the Torah of Moses. By the time of Augustine, philosophy was becoming assimilated in this way with the other secular, mathematical, and dialectical knowledge necessary for the Christian exegete—but in no way sufficient unto itself. The recovery of Aristotle’s writings in the West, and the development of the medieval universities, saw his dialectics adopted as a means for theologians to respond to problems Christian dogma posed to reason, whereas commentary on his dialectical, ethical, and physical writings became the keystone of teaching in the arts faculties. As Hadot comments, “Aristotle” in this way became “Aristotelianism,” and the conception of university philosophy as entirely an exegetical or “scholastic” endeavor was born. It would survive the rise of the natural sciences and the universities’ passing from the Church’s to the secular State’s authority.  According to Hadot, there remains a “radical opposition” between the modern, diploma-issuing university, which promotes specific levels of objectified, mostly written forms of knowledge or transferrable skills, and the ancient philosophical school, “which addressed individuals in order to transform their entire personality . . . to train people for their career as human beings . . .” (WAP 260).

c. The Permanence of the Ancient Conception of Philosophy

Nevertheless, Hadot argues that since the Middle Ages, philosophers both within and outside of the universities have kept alive what he terms the “vital, existential dimension” of ancient philosophy (WAP 261). Already in the Middle Ages, scholastic commentators noted the weight of passages in Aristotle’s Nicomachean Ethics (book X) as pointing toward the theoretical way of life as the culmination of philosophia.  Petrarch and Erasmus differently contested that philosophy could be reduced to the commentary on texts, since this in no way makes the scholar better. In a way which contrasts with Michel Foucault’s claims concerning the history of philosophy as a way of life, Hadot sees elements of Stoicism in Descartes’ conception of adequate or comprehensive representation, and his choice to write Meditations; also in Kant’s contrast of the “worldly” “Idea of Philosopher” from the “scholastic” “artists of reason,” and Kant’s central critical notion of the primacy of practical reason.  At different points in his oeuvre, Hadot also cites Montaigne, Shaftesbury, Rousseau, Goethe, Thoreau, Schopenhauer, Kierkegaard, Nietzsche, Merleau-Ponty, and Wittgenstein as legatees to the ancient conception of philosophy as a way of life that it was his own life’s work to try to re-animate.

7. References and Further Reading

a. Works in French

  • Hadot, P, (with Henry, I.P.). (1960). Marius Victorinus, Traités théologiques sur la Trinité, Cerf 1960 (Sources Chrétiennes nos. 68 &69)
  • Porphyre et Victorinus. Paris, Institut d'Etudes augustiniennes, 1968. (Collection des études augustiniennes. Série antiquité; 32–33).
  • Marius Victorinus: recherches sur sa vie et ses oeuvres, 1971. (Collection des études augustiniennes. Série antiquité ; 44).
  • Exercices spirituels et philosophie antique. Paris, Etudes augustiniennes, 1981. (Collection des études augustiniennes. Série antiquité ; 88).
  • Hadot, Pierre. (1992). La citadelle intérieure. Introduction aux Pensées de Marc Aurèle. Paris: Fayard.
  • Hadot, Pierre. (1995). Qu'est-ce que la philosophie antique ? Paris: Gallimard. (Folio essais; 280).
  • Hadot, Pierre. (1997). Plotin ou la simplicité du regard (4e éd.) Paris: Gallimard. [1e éd. 1963]. (Folio esais; 302).
  • Etudes de philosophie ancienne. Paris, Les Belles Lettres, 1998. (L'âne d'or ; 8). (recueil d'articles)
  • Marc Aurèle. Ecrits pour lui même, texte établi et traduit par Pierre Hadot, avec la collaboration de Concetta Luna, vol. 1 (general introduction and Book 1). Paris, Collection Budé, 1998.
  • Plotin. Porphyre. Études néoplatoniciennes. Paris, Les Belles Lettres, 1999. (L'âne d'or ; 10). (recueil d'articles)
  • La philosophie comme manière de vivre. Paris, Albin Michel, 2002. (Itinéraires du savoir).
  • Exercices spirituels et philosophie antique, nouvelle éd. Paris, Albin Michel, 2002. (Bibliothèque de l'évolution de l'humanité).
  • Le voile d'Isis. Essai sur l'histoire de l'idée de nature. Paris, Gallimard, 2004. (NRF essais).
  • Wittgenstein et les limites du langage. Paris, J. Vrin, 2004. (Bibliothèque d'histoire de la philosophie).
  • Apprendre à philosopher dans l'antiquité. L'enseignement du Manuel d'Epictète et son commentaire néoplatonicien (avec Ilsetraut Hadot). Paris, LGF, 2004. (Le livre de poche; 603).

b. Works in English

  • Hadot, Pierre. (1993). Plotinus, Or the Simplicity of Vision. (Michael Chase, Trans.) Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Hadot, Pierre. (1995). Philosophy as a Way of Life. (Michael Chase, Trans.) Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Hadot, Pierre. (1998). The Inner Citadel; the Meditations of Marcus Aurelius. Harvard University Press.
  • Hadot, Pierre. (2002). What is Ancient Philosophy? (Michael Chase, Trans.) Harvard University Press.
  • Hadot, Pierre. (2006). The Veil of Isis. (Michael Chase, Trans.) Cambridge: Belknap Press.
  • Hadot, Pierre. (2005). There are Nowadays Professors of Philosophy, But Not Philosophers, The Journal of Speculative Philosophy 19.3, 229-237.
  • Conversations with Jeannie Carlier and Arnold I. Davidson, trans. Marc Djaballah (Stanford, CA: Stanford University Press, 2009).

c. Selected Articles on Hadot

  • Chase, Michael. "Remembering Pierre Hadot", Parts 1 and 2, April 28, 2010,
  • Davidson, Arnold. (Spring 1990). Spiritual Exercises and Ancient Philosophy: An Introduction to Pierre Hadot. Critical Inquiry, 16, 475-482.
  • Davidson, Arnold.  (1995). Introduction: Pierre Hadot and the Spiritual Phenomenon of Ancient Philosophy, in Pierre Hadot, Philosophy as a Way of Life (Michael Chase, Trans.) Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Donato, Antonio. (2009, September). Review: Pierre Hadot, The Present Alone is Our Happiness: Conversations with Jeannie Carlier and Arnold I. Davidson. Foucault Studies, 7, 164-169.Flynn, Thomas. (2005, September). Philosophy as a Way of Life: Foucault and Hadot. Philosophy & Social Criticism, 31 (5-6), 609-622.
  • Force, Pierre. (2011, February). The Teeth of Time: Meaning and Misunderstanding in the History of Ideas. History and Theory, 50, 20-40.
  • Gregor, Bryan. (2011, January). The Text as Mirror: Kierkegaard and Hadot on Transformative Reading. History of Philosophy Quarterly, 28 (1).
  • Hankey, Wayne. (2003). Philosophy as Way of Life for Christians?: Iamblichan and Porphyrian Reflections on Religion, Virtue, and Philosophy in Thomas Aquinas. Laval théologique et philosophique, 59 (2), 193-224.
  • Lorenzi, Daniele. “La vie comme "réel" de la philosophie. Cavell, Foucault, Hadot et les techniques de l'ordinaire”, en La voix et la vertu. Variétés du perfectionnisme moral, PUF, Paris 2010, pp. 469-487.
  • Winkler, Albert Keith. (2002). “Review of Pierre Hadot, What is Ancient Philosophy?” Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 362 pp. xiv.
  • Zeyl, Donald. (2003). Review: Pierre Hadot, What is Ancient Philosophy? Notre Dame Philosophical Reviews.


Author Information

Matthew Sharpe
Deakin University

Aristotle: Logic

Aristotelian logic, after a great and early triumph, consolidated its position of influence to rule over the philosophical world throughout the Middle Ages up until the 19th Century.  All that changed in a hurry when modern logicians embraced a new kind of mathematical logic and pushed out what they regarded as the antiquated and clunky method of syllogisms.  Although Aristotle’s very rich and expansive account of logic differs in key ways from modern approaches, it is more than a historical curiosity.  It provides an alternative way of approaching logic and continues to provide critical insights into contemporary issues and concerns.  The main thrust of this article is to explain Aristotle’s logical system as a whole while correcting some prominent misconceptions that persist in the popular understanding and even in some of the specialized literature.  Before getting down to business, it is important to point out that Aristotle is a synoptic thinker with an over-arching theory that ties together all aspects and fields of philosophy.  He does not view logic as a separate, self-sufficient subject-matter, to be considered in isolation from other aspects of disciplined inquiry.  Although we cannot consider all the details of his encyclopedic approach, we can sketch out the larger picture in a way that illuminates the general thrust of his system.  For the purposes of this entry, let us define logic as that field of inquiry which investigates how we reason correctly (and, by extension, how we reason incorrectly).  Aristotle does not believe that the purpose of logic is to prove that human beings can have knowledge.  (He dismisses excessive scepticism.)  The aim of logic is the elaboration of a coherent system that allows us to investigate, classify, and evaluate good and bad forms of reasoning.

Table of Contents

  1. The Organon
  2. Categories
  3. From Words into Propositions
  4. Kinds of Propositions
  5. Square of Opposition
  6. Laws of Thought
  7. Existential Assumptions
  8. Form versus Content
  9. The Syllogism
  10. Inductive Syllogism
  11. Deduction versus Induction
  12. Science
  13. Non-Discursive Reasoning
  14. Rhetoric
  15. Fallacies
  16. Moral Reasoning
  17. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. The Organon

To those used to the silver tones of an accomplished writer like Plato, Aristotle’s prose will seem, at first glance, a difficult read.  What we have are largely notes, written at various points in his career, for different purposes, edited and cobbled together by later followers.  The style of the resulting collection is often rambling, repetitious, obscure, and disjointed.  There are many arcane, puzzling, and perhaps contradictory passages.  This problem is compounded by the abstract, technical vocabulary logic sometimes requires and by the wide-ranging scope and the scattered nature of Aristotle’s observations.  Some familiarity with Greek terminology is required if one hopes to capture the nuances in his thought.  Classicists and scholars do argue, of course, about the precise Greek meaning of key words or phrases but many of these debates involve minor points of interpretation that cannot concern us here.  Aristotle’s logical vocabulary needs to be understood within the larger context of his system as a whole.  Many good translations of Aristotle are available.  (Parenthetical citations below include the approximate Bekker number (the scholarly notation for referring to Aristotelian passages according to page, column, and line number of a standard edition), the English title of the work, and the name of the translator.)

Ancient commentators regarded logic as a widely-applicable instrument or method for careful thinking.  They grouped Aristotle’s six logical treatises into a sort of manual they called the Organon (Greek for “tool”).  The Organon included the Categories, On Interpretation, the Prior Analytics, the Posterior Analytics, the Topics, and On Sophistical Refutations.  These books touch on many issues: the logical structure of propositions, the proper structure of arguments (syllogisms), the difference between induction and deduction, the nature of scientific knowledge, basic fallacies (forms of specious reasoning), debating techniques, and so on.  But we cannot confine our present investigations to the Organon.  Aristotle comments on the principle of non-contradiction in the Metaphysics, on less rigorous forms of argument in the Rhetoric, on the intellectual virtues in the Nicomachean Ethics, on the difference between truth and falsity in On the Soul, and so on.  We cannot overlook such important passages if we wish to gain an adequate understanding of Aristotelian logic.

2. Categories

The world, as Aristotle describes it in his Categories, is composed of substances—separate, individual things—to which various characterizations or properties can be ascribed.  Each substance is a unified whole composed of interlocking parts.  There are two kinds of substances.  A primary substance is (in the simplest instance) an independent (or detachable) object, composed of matter, characterized by form.  Individual living organisms—a man, a rainbow trout, an oak tree—provide the most unambiguous examples of primary substances.  Secondary substances are the larger groups, the species or genera, to which these individual organisms belong.  So man, horse, mammals, animals (and so on) would be examples of secondary substances.  As we shall see, Aristotle’s logic is about correctly attributing specific properties to secondary substances (and therefore, indirectly, about attributing these properties to primary substances or individual things).

Aristotle elaborates a logic that is designed to describe what exists in the world.  We may well wonder then, how many different ways can we describe something?  In his Categories (4.1b25-2a4), Aristotle enumerates ten different ways of describing something.  These categories (Greek=kategoria, deriving from the verb to indicate, signify) include (1) substance, (2) quantity, (3) quality, (4) relation, (5) where, (6) when, (7) being-in-a-position, (8) possessing, (9) doing or (10) undergoing something or being affected by something.  In the Topics (I.9, 103b20-25), he includes the same list, replacing “substance” (ousia) with “essence” (ti esti).  We can, along with Aristotle, give an example of each kind of description: (1) to designate something as a “horse” or a “man” is to identify it as a substance or to attribute an essence to it; (2) to say that the wall is four feet long is to describe it in terms of quantity; (3) to say that the roof  is “white” is to ascribe a quality to it; (4) to say that your weight is “double” mine is to describe a relation between the two; (5) to say something happened in the market-place is to explain where; (6) to say it happened last year is to explain when; (7) to say an old man is sitting is to describe his position; (8) to say the girl has shoes on is to describe what she possesses; (9) to say the head chef is cutting a carrot with a knife is to describe what he is doing; and finally, (10) to say wood is being burned in the fireplace is to describe what it means for the wood to undergo burning or to be affected by fire.  Commentators claim that these ten categories represent either different descriptions of being or different kinds of being.  (To be a substance is to be in a certain way; to possess quantity is to be in a certain way; to possess a quality is to be in a certain way, and so on.)  There is nothing magical about the number ten.  Aristotle gives shorter lists elsewhere. (Compare Posterior Analytics, I.22.83a22-24, where he lists seven predications, for example).  Whether Aristotle intends the longer lists as a complete enumeration of all conceivable types of descriptions is an open question.  Scholars have noticed that the first category, substance or essence, seems to be fundamentally different than the others; it is what something is in the most complete and perfect way.

3. From Words into Propositions

Aristotle does not believe that all reasoning deals with words.  (Moral decision-making is, for Aristotle, a form of reasoning that can occur without words.)  Still, words are a good place to begin our study of his logic.  Logic, as we now understand it, chiefly has to do with how we evaluate arguments.  But arguments are made of statements, which are, in turn, made of words.  In Aristotelian logic, the most basic statement is a proposition, a complete sentence that asserts something.  (There are other kinds of sentences—prayers, questions, commands—that do not assert anything true or false about the world and which, therefore, exist outside the purview of logic.)  A proposition is ideally composed of at least three words: a subject (a word naming a substance), a predicate (a word naming a property), and a connecting verb, what logicians call a copula (Latin, for “bond” or “connection”).  Consider the simple statement: “Socrates is wise.”  Socrates is the subject; the property of being wise is the predicate, and the verb “is” (the copula) links Socrates and wisdom together in a single affirmation.  We can express all this symbolically as “S is P” where “S” stands for the subject “Socrates” and “P” stands for the predicate “being wise.”  The sentence “Socrates is wise” (or symbolically, “S is P”) qualifies as a proposition; it is a statement that claims that something is true about the world.  Paradigmatically, the subject would be a (secondary) substance (a natural division of primary substances) and the predicate would be a necessary or essential property as in:  “birds are feathered,” or “triangles have interior angles equal to two right angles,” or “fire is upward-moving.”  But any overly restrictive metaphysical idea about what terms in a proposition mean seems to unnecessarily restrict intelligent discourse.  Suppose someone were to claim that “anger is unethical.”  But anger is not a substance; it is a property of a substance (an organism).  Still, it makes perfect sense to predicate properties of anger.  We can say that anger is unethical, hard to control, an excess of passion, familiar enough, and so on.  Aristotle himself exhibits some flexibility here.  Still, there is something to Aristotle’s view that the closer a proposition is to the metaphysical structure of the world, the more it counts as knowledge.  Aristotle has an all-embracing view of logic and yet believes that, what we could call “metaphysical correctness” produces a more rigorous, scientific form of logical expression.

Of course, it is not enough to produce propositions; what we are after is true propositions.  Aristotle believes that only propositions are true or false.  Truth or falsity (at least with respect to linguistic expression) is a matter of combining words into complete propositions that purport to assert something about the world.  Individual words or incomplete phrases, considered by themselves, are neither true or false.  To say, “Socrates,” or “jumping up and down,” or “brilliant red” is not to assert anything true or false about the world.  It is to repeat words without making any claim about the way things are.  In the Metaphysics, Aristotle provides his own definition of true and false: “to say of what is that it is, and of what is not that it is not, is true”; and “to say of what is that it is not, or of what is not that it is, is false.” (IV.7.1011b25, Ross.)  In other words, a true proposition corresponds to way things are.  But Aristotle is not proposing a correspondence theory of truth as an expert would understand it.  He is operating at a more basic level.  Consider the statement: “Spiders have eight legs.”  (Symbolically, “All S is P,” where S, the subject, is “spiders”; P, the predicate, is “the state of being eight-legged,” and the verb “is” functions as the copula.)  What does it mean to say that this claim is true?  If we observe spiders to discover how many legs they have, we will find that (except in a few odd cases) spiders do have eight legs, so the proposition will be true because what it says matches reality.  As we shall see, Aristotle’s logic is designed to produce just this kind of general statement.

4. Kinds of Propositions

Aristotle suggests that all propositions must either affirm or deny something.  Every proposition must be either an affirmation or a negation; it cannot be both.  He also points out that propositions can make claims about what necessarily is the case, about what possibly is the case, or even about what is impossible.  His modal logic, which deals with these further qualifications about possibility or necessity, presents difficulties of interpretation.  We will focus on his assertoric (or non-modal) logic here.  Still, many of Aristotle’s points about necessity and possibility seem highly intuitive.  In one famous example about a hypothetical sea battle, he observes that the necessary truth of a mere proposition does not trump the uncertainty of future events.  Because it is necessarily true that there will be or will not be a sea battle tomorrow, we cannot conclude that either alternative is necessarily true.  (De Interpretatione, 9.19a30ff.)  So the necessity that attaches to the proposition “there will or will not be a sea battle tomorrow” does not transfer over to the claim ‘that there will be a sea battle tomorrow” or to the claim “there will not be a sea battle tomorrow.”  Aristotle goes out of his way to emphasize the point that our personal beliefs about what will happen in the future do not determine whether the individual propositions are true.  (Note that we must not confuse the necessary truth of a proposition with the necessity that precipitates the conclusion of a deductively-valid argument. The former is sometimes called “material,” “non-logical,” or “metaphysical” necessity; the later, “formal,” “deductive,” or “logical” necessity.”  We discuss these issues further below.)

Aristotle claims that all propositions can be expressed using the “Subject copula Predicate” formula and that complex propositions are, on closer inspection, collections of simpler claims that display, in turn, this fundamental structure.  Having fixed the proper logical form of a proposition, he goes on to classify different kinds of propositions.  He begins by distinguishing between particular terms and universal terms.  (The term he uses for “universal” is the Greek “katholou.”)  Particular terms refer to individual things; universal terms refer to groups of things.  The name “Socrates” is a particular term because it refers to a single human being; the word “spiders” is a universal term for it universally applies to all members of the group “spiders.”  Aristotle realizes, of course, that universal terms may be used to refer to parts of a group as well as to entire groups.  We may claim that all spiders have eight legs or that only some spiders have book-lungs.  In the first case, a property, eight-leggedness, is predicated of the entire group referred to by the universal term; in the second case, the property of having book-lungs is predicated of only part of the group.  So, to use Aristotelian language, one may predicate a property universally or not universally of the group referred to by a universal term.

This brings us to Aristotle’s classification of the four different kinds of categorical propositions (called “categorical propositions” because they assert a relationship between two categories or kinds).  Each different categorical proposition possesses quantity insomuch as it represents a universal or a particular predication (referring to all or only some members of the subject class).  It also possesses a definite quality (positive or negative) insomuch as it affirms or denies the specified predication.  The adjectives “all,” “no,” and “some” (which is understood as meaning “at least one”) determine the quantity of the proposition; the quality is determined by whether the verb is in the affirmative or the negative.  Rather than going into the details of Aristotle’s original texts, suffice it to say that contemporary logicians generally distinguish between four logical possibilities:

1.  Universal Affirmation: All S are P (called A statements from the Latin, “AFFIRMO”: I affirm).

2.  Universal Negation: No S are P (called E statements from “NEGO”: I deny).

3.  Particular Affirmation: Some S are P (called I statements from AFFIRMO).

4.  Particular Negation: Some S are not P (called O statements from NEGO).

Note that these four possibilities are not, in every instance, mutually exclusive.  As mentioned above, particular statements using the modifier “some” refer to at least one member of a group.  To say that “some S are P” is to say that “at least one S is P”; to say that “some S are not P” is to say that “at least one S is not P.”  It must follow then (at least on Aristotle’s system) that universal statements require the corresponding particular statement.  If “All S are P,” at least one S must be P; that is, the particular statement “Some S are P” must be true.  Again, if “No S are P,” at least one S must not be P; that is, the particular statement “Some S are not P” must be true.  (More on this, with qualifications, below.)  Note also that Aristotle treats propositions with an individual subject such as “Socrates is wise” as universal propositions (as if the proposition was saying something like “all instances of Socrates” are wise.)  One caveat:  Although we cannot linger on further complications here, keep in mind that this is not the only way to divide up logical possibility.

5. Square of Opposition

Aristotle examines the way in which these four different categorical propositions are related to one another.  His views have come down to us as “the square of opposition,” a mnemonic diagram that captures, systematizes, and slightly extends what Aristotle says in De Interpretatione. (Cf. 6.17a25ff.)

Figure 1

The Traditional Square of Opposition


As it turns out, we can use a square with crossed interior diagonals (Fig. 1 above) to identify four kinds of relationships that hold between different pairs of categorical propositions.  Consider each relationship in turn.

1)  Contradictory propositions possess opposite truth-values.  In the diagram, they are linked by a diagonal line.  If one of two contradictories is true, the other must be false, and vice versa.  So the A proposition (All S are P) and the O proposition (Some S are not P) are contradictories.  Clearly, if it is true that “all S are P,” then the O statement that “some S are not P” must be false.  And if it is true that “some S are not P,” then the A statement that “all S are P” must be false.  The same relationship holds between E (No S are P) and I (Some S are P) propositions.  To use a simple example: If it is true that “all birds lay eggs,” then it must be false that “some birds do not lay eggs.”  And if it is true that “some birds do not fly,” then it must be false that “all birds fly.”

2)  Contrary propositions cannot both be true.  The top horizontal line in the square joining the A proposition (All S are P) to the E proposition (No S are P) represents this logical relationship.  Clearly, it cannot be true that “all S are P” and that “no S are P.”  The truth of one of these contrary propositions excludes the truth of the other.  It is possible, however, that both statements are false as in the case where some S are P and some (other) S are not P.  So, for example, the statements “all politicians tell lies” and “no politicians tell lies” cannot both be true.  They will, however, both be false if it is indeed the case that some politicians tell lies whereas some do not.

3)  The relationship of subalternation results when the truth of a universal proposition, “the superaltern,” requires the truth of a second particular proposition, “the subaltern.”  The vertical lines moving downward from the top to the bottom of the square in the diagram represent this condition.  Clearly, if all members of an existent group possess (or do not possess) a specific characteristic, it must follow that any smaller subset of that group must possess (or not possess) that specific characteristic.  If the A proposition (All S are P) is true, it must follow that the I proposition (“Some S are P”) must be true.  Again, if the E proposition (No S are P) is true, it must follow that the O proposition (Some S are not P) must be true.  Consider, for example, the statement, “all cheetahs are fast.”  If every member of the whole group of cheetahs is fast, then it must be the case that at least one member of the group of cheetahs is fast; that is, the statement “some cheetahs are fast” must be true.  And, to reformulate the same example as a negation, if it is true that “no cheetahs are slow,” then it must be the case that at least one member of the group of cheetahs is not slow; that is, the statement “some cheetahs are not slow” must be true.

Note that subalternation does not work in the opposite direction.  If “Some S are P,” it need not follow that “All S are P.”  And if “Some S are not P,” it need not follow that “No S are P.”  We should also point out that if the subaltern is false, it must follow that the superaltern is false.  If it is false to say that “Some S are P,” it must be false to say that “All S are P.”  And if it is false to say that “Some S are not P,” it must be false to say that “No S are P.”

4)  Subcontrary propositions cannot both be false.  The bottom horizontal line in the square joining the I proposition (Some S are P) to the O proposition (Some S are not P) represents this kind of subcontrary relationship.  Keeping to the assumptions implicit in Aristotle’s system, there are only three possibilities: (1) All S have property P; in which case, it must also be true (by subalternation) that “some S are P.”  (2) No S have property P; in which case it must also be true (by subalternation) that “some S are not P.”  (3)  Some S have and some S do not have property P; in which case it will be true that “some S are P” and that “some S are not P.”  It follows that at least one of a pair of subcontrary propositions must be true and that both will be true in cases where P is partially predicated of S.  So, for example, both members of the subcontrary pair “some men have beards” and “some men do not have beards” are true.  They are both true because having a beard is a contingent or variable male attribute.  In contrast, only one member of the subcontrary pair “some snakes are legless” and “some snakes are not legless” is true.  As all snakes are legless, the proposition “some snakes are not legless” must be false.

Traditional logicians, inspired by Aristotle’s wide-ranging comments, identified a series of “immediate inferences” as a way of deriving new propositions through a routine rearrangement of terms.  Subalternation is an obvious example of immediate inference.  From “All S are P” we can immediately infer—that is, without argument—that “some S are P.”  They also recognized conversion, obversion, and contraposition as immediate inferences.

In conversion, one interchanges the S and P terms.  If, for example, we know that “No S is P,” we can immediately infer that “No P is S.”  (Once we know that “no circles are triangles,” we know right away that “no triangles are circles.”)

In obversion, one negates the predicate term while replacing it with the predicate term of opposite quality.  If, for example, we know that “Some S are P,” we can immediately infer the obverse, “Some S are not non-P.”  (Once we know that “some students are happy,” we know right away that “some students are not unhappy.”)

Finally, in contraposition, one negates both terms and reverses their order.  If, for example, we know that “All S are P,” we can infer the contrapositive “All non-P are non-S.”  (Once we know that “all voters are adults,” we know right away that “all children are unable to vote.”)  More specific rules, restrictions, and details are readily available elsewhere.

6. Laws of Thought

During the 18th, 19th, and early 20th Century, scholars who saw themselves as carrying on the Aristotelian and Medieval tradition in logic, often pointed to the “laws of thought” as the basis of all logic.  One still encounters this approach in textbook accounts of informal logic.  The usual list of logical laws (or logical first principles) includes three axioms: the law of identity, the law of non-contradiction, and the law of excluded middle.  (Some authors include a law of sufficient reason, that every event or claim must have a sufficient reason or explanation, and so forth.)  It would be a gross simplification to argue that these ideas derive exclusively from Aristotle or to suggest (as some authors seem to imply) that he self-consciously presented a theory uniquely derived from these three laws.  The idea is rather that Aristotle’s theory presupposes these principles and/or that he discusses or alludes to them somewhere in his work.  Traditional logicians did not regard them as abstruse or esoteric doctrines but as manifestly obvious principles that require assent for logical discourse to be possible.

The law of identity could be summarized as the patently unremarkable but seemingly inescapable notion that things must be, of course, identical with themselves.  Expressed symbolically: “A is A,” where A is an individual, a species, or a genus.  Although Aristotle never explicitly enunciates this law, he does observe, in the Metaphysics, that “the fact that a thing is itself is [the only] answer to all such questions as why the man is man, or the musician musical.” (VII.17.1041a16-18, Ross.)  This suggests that he does accept, unsurprisingly, the perfectly obvious idea that things are themselves.  If, however, identical things must possess identical attributes, this opens the door to various logical maneuvers.  One can, for example, substitute equivalent terms for one another and, even more portentously, one can arrive at some conception of analogy and induction.  Aristotle writes, “all water is said to be . . .  the same as all water  . . .  because of a certain likeness.” (Topics, I.7.103a19-20, Pickard-Cambridge.)  If water is water, then by the law of identity, anything we discover to be water must possess the same water-properties.

Aristotle provides several formulations of the law of non-contradiction, the idea that logically correct propositions cannot affirm and deny the same thing:

“It is impossible for anyone to believe the same thing to be and not be.” (Metaphysics, IV.3.1005b23-24, Ross.)

“The same attribute cannot at the same time belong and not belong to the same subject in the same respect.” (Ibid., IV.3.1005b19-20.)

“The most indisputable of all beliefs is that contradictory statements are not at the same time true.” (Ibid., IV.6.1011b13-14.)

Symbolically, the law of non-contradiction is sometimes represented as “not (A and not A).”

The law of excluded middle can be summarized as the idea that every proposition must be either true or false, not both and not neither.  In Aristotle’s words, “It is necessary for the affirmation or the negation to be true or false.”  (De Interpretatione, 9.18a28-29, Ackrill.)  Symbolically, we can represent the law of excluded middle as an exclusive disjunction: “A is true or A is false,” where only one alternative holds.  Because every proposition must be true or false, it does not follow, of course, that we can know if a particular proposition is true or false.

Despite perennial challenges to these so-called laws (by intuitionists, dialetheists, and others), Aristotelians inevitably claim that such counterarguments hinge on some unresolved ambiguity (equivocation), on a conflation of what we know with what is actually the case, on a false or static account of identity, or on some other failure to fully grasp the implications of what one is saying.

7. Existential Assumptions

Before we move on to consider Aristotle’s account of the syllogism, we need to clear up some widespread misconceptions and explain a few things about Aristotle’s project as a whole.  Criticisms of Aristotle’s logic often assume that what Aristotle was trying to do coincides with the basic project of modern logic.  Begin with the usual criticism brought against the traditional square of opposition.  For reasons we will not explore, modern logicians assume that universal claims about non-existent objects (or empty sets) are true but that particular claims about them are false.  On this reading, the claim that “all fairy-god mothers are beautiful” is true, whereas the claim that “some fairy-god mothers are beautiful” is false.  Clearly, this clashes with the traditional square of opposition.  By simple subalternation, the truth of the proposition “all fairy-god mothers are beautiful” requires the truth of the proposition “some fairy-god mothers are beautiful.”  If the first claim is true, the second claim must also be true.  For this and similar reasons, some modern logicians dismiss the traditional square as inadequate, claiming that Aristotle made a mistake or overlooked relevant issues.  Aristotle, however, is involved in a specialized project.  He elaborates an alternative logic, specifically adapted to the problems he is trying to solve.

Aristotle devises a companion-logic for science.  He relegates fictions like fairy godmothers and mermaids and unicorns to the realms of poetry and literature.  In his mind, they exist outside the ambit of science.  This is why he leaves no room for such non-existent entities in his logic.  This is a thoughtful choice, not an inadvertent omission.  Technically, Aristotelian science is a search for definitions, where a definition is “a phrase signifying a thing’s essence.” (Topics, I.5.102a37, Pickard-Cambridge.)  To possess an essence—is literally to possess a “what-it-is-to-be” something (to ti ēn einai).  Because non-existent entities cannot be anything, they do not, in Aristotle’s mind, possess an essence.  They cannot be defined.  Aristotle makes this point explicitly in the Posterior Analytics.  He points out that a definition of a goat-stag, a cross between a goat and a deer (the ancient equivalent of a unicorn), is impossible.  He writes, “no one knows the nature of what does not exist—[we] can know the meaning of the phrase or name ‘goat-stag’ but not what the essential nature of a goat-stag is.” (II.7.92b6-8, Mure.)  Because we cannot know what the essential nature of a goat-stag is—indeed, it has no essential nature—we cannot provide a proper definition of a goat-stag.  So the study of goat-stags (or unicorns) is not open to scientific investigation.  Aristotle sets about designing a logic that is intended to display relations between scientific propositions, where science is understood as a search for essential definitions.  This is why he leaves no place for fictional entities like goat-stags (or unicorns).  Hence, the assumed validity of a logical maneuver like subalternation.

8. Form versus Content

However, this is not the only way Aristotle’s approach parts ways with more modern assumptions.  Some modern logicians might define logic as that philosophical inquiry which considers the form not the content of propositions.  Aristotle’s logic is unapologetically metaphysical.  We cannot properly understand what Aristotle is about by separating form from content.  Suppose, for example, I was to claim that (1) all birds have feathers and (2) that everyone in the Tremblay family wears a red hat.  These two claims possess the same very same propositional form, A.  We can represent the first claim as: “All S are P,” where S=birds, and P=being feathered.  And we can also represent the second claim as “All S are P,” where S=members of the Tremblay family, and P=wearing a red hat.  Considered from an Aristotelian point of view, however, these two “All S are P” propositions possess a very different logical status.  Aristotle would view the relationship between birds and feathers expressed in the first proposition as a necessary link, for it is of the essence of birds to be feathered.  Something cannot be a bird and lack feathers.  The link between membership in the Tremblay family and the practice of wearing a red hat described in the second proposition is, in sharp contrast, a contingent fact about the world.  A member of the Tremblay family who wore a green hat would still be a member of the Tremblay family.  The fact that the Tremblays only wear red hats (because it is presently the fashion in Quebec) is an accidental (or surface) feature of what a Tremblay is.  So this second relationship holds in a much weaker sense.  In Aristotle’s mind, this has important consequences not just for metaphysics, but for logic.

It is hard to capture in modern English the underlying metaphysical force in Aristotle’s categorical statements.  In the Prior Analytics Aristotle renders the phrase “S is P” as “P belongs to S.”  The sense of belonging here is crucial.  Aristotle wants a logic that tells us what belongs to what.  But there are different levels of belonging.  My billfold belongs to me but this is a very tenuous sort of belonging.  The way my billfold belongs to me pales in significance to, say, the way a bill belongs to a duck-billed platypus.  It is not simply that the bill is physically attached to the platypus.  Even if you were to cut off the bill of a platypus, this would just create a deformed platypus; it would not change the sense of necessary belonging that connects platypuses and bills.  The deep nature of a platypus requires—it necessitates—a bill.  In so much as logic is about discovering necessary relationships, it is not the mere arrangement of terms and symbols but their substantive meaning that is at issue.

As only one consequence of this “metaphysical attitude,” consider Aristotle’s attitude towards inductive generalizations. Aristotle would have no patience for the modern penchant for purely statistical interpretations of inductive generalizations.  It is not the number of times something happens that matters.  It is the deep nature of the thing that counts.  If the wicked boy (or girl) next door pulls three legs off a spider, this is just happenstance.  This five-legged spider does not (for Aristotle) present a serious counterexample to the claim that “all spiders are eight-legged.”  The fact that someone can pull legs off a spider does not change the fact that there is a necessary connection between spiders and having eight legs.  Aristotle is too keen a biologist not to recognize that there are accidents and monstrosities in the world, but the existence of these individual imperfections does not change the deep nature of things.  Aristotle recognizes then that some types of belonging are more substantial—that is, more real—than others.  But this has repercussions for the ways in which we evaluate arguments.  In Aristotle’s mind, the strength of the logical connection that ties a conclusion to the premises in an argument depends, decisively, on the metaphysical status of the claims we are making.  Another example may help.  Suppose I were to argue, first:  “Ostriches are birds; all birds have feathers, therefore, ostriches have feathers.”  Then, second, “Hélène is the youngest daughter of the Tremblay family; all members of the Tremblay family wear red hats; therefore, Hélène wears a red hat.”  These arguments possess the same form.  (We will worry about formal details later.)  But, to Aristotle’s way of thinking, the first argument is, logically, more rigorous than the second.  Its conclusion follows from the essential and therefore necessary features of birds.  In the second argument, the conclusion only follows from the contingent state of fashion in Quebec.  In Aristotelian logic, the strength of an argument depends, in some important way, on metaphysical issues.  We can’t simply say “All S are P; and so forth” and be done with it.  We have to know what “S” and “P” stand for.  This is very different than modern symbolic logic.  Although Aristotle does use letters to take the place of variable terms in a logical relation, we should not be misled into thinking that the substantive content of what is being discussed does not matter.

9. The Syllogism

We are now in a position to consider Aristotle’s theory of the syllogism.  Although one senses that Aristotle took great pride in these accomplishments, we could complain that the persistent focus on the mechanics of the valid syllogism has obscured his larger project.  We will only cover the most basic points here, largely ignoring hypothetical syllogisms, modal syllogisms, extended syllogisms (sorites), inter alia.  The syllogistic now taught in undergraduate philosophy departments represents a later development of Aristotle’s ideas, after they were reworked at the hands of Medieval and modern logicians.  We will begin with a brief account of the way syllogisms are presented in modern logic and then move on to discussion of Aristotle’s somewhat different account.

We can define a syllogism, in relation to its logical form, as an argument made up of three categorical propositions, two premises (which set out the evidence), and a conclusion (that follows logically from the premises).  In the standard account, the propositions are composed of three terms, a subject term, a predicate term, and a middle term: the subject term is the (grammatical) subject of the conclusion; the predicate term modifies the subject in the conclusion, and the middle term links the subject and predicate terms in the premises.  The subject and predicate terms appear in different premises; the middle term appears once in each premise.  The premise with the predicate term and the middle term is called the major premise; the premise with the subject term and the middle term is called the minor premise.  Because syllogisms depend on the precise arrangement of terms, syllogistic logic is sometimes referred to as term logic.  Most readers of this piece are already familiar with some version of a proverbial (non-Aristotelian) example: “All men are mortal; (all) Socrates, Plato, and Aristotle are men; therefore, Socrates, Plato and Aristotle are mortal.”  If we symbolize the three terms in this syllogism such that Middle Term, M=man; Subject Term, S=Socrates, Plato, Aristotle; Predicate Term, P=mortal; we can represent the argument as: Major Premise:  All M is P;  Minor Premise:  All S is M;  Conclusion:  So, All S is P.  In the Middle Ages, scholars came up with Latin names for valid syllogisms, using vowels to represent the position of each categorical proposition.  (Their list is readily available elsewhere.)  The precise arrangement of propositions in this syllogism goes by the Latin moniker “Barbara” because the syllogism is composed of three A propositions: hence, BArbArA: AAA.  A syllogism in Barbara is clearly valid where validity can be understood (in modern terms) as the requirement that if the premises of the argument are true, then the conclusion must be true.  Modern textbook authors generally prove the validity of syllogisms in two ways.  First, they use a number of different rules.  For example: “when major and minor terms are universal in the conclusion they must be universal in the premises”; “if one premise is negative, the conclusion must be negative”; “the middle term in the premises must be distributed (include every member of a class) at least once,” and so on.  Second, they use Venn diagrams, intersecting circles marked to indicate the extension (or range) of different terms, to determine if the information contained in the conclusion is also included in the premises.

Modern logicians, who still hold to traditional conventions, classify syllogisms according to figure and mood.  The four figure classification derives from Aristotle; the mood classification, from Medieval logicians.  One determines the figure of a syllogism by recording the positions the middle term takes in the two premises.  So, for Barbara above, the figure is MP-SM, generally referred to as Figure 1.  One determines the mood of a syllogism by recording the precise arrangement of categorical propositions.  So, for Barbara, the mood is AAA.  By tabulating figures and moods, we can make an inventory of valid syllogisms.  (Medieval philosophers devised a mnemonic poem for such purposes that begins with the line “Barbara, Celarent, Darii, Ferioque priorisis.”  Details can be found in many textbooks.)  Although traditional classroom treatments prefer to stick to this time-honoured approach, Fred Sommers and George Englebretsen have devised a more up-to-date term logic that uses equations with “+” and “−” operators and is more attuned to natural language reasoning than the usual predicate logic.  Turn then to a brief discussion of Aristotle’s own account of the syllogism.

As already mentioned, we need to distinguish between two kinds of necessity.  Aristotle believes in metaphysical or natural necessity.  Birds must have feathers because that is their nature.  So the proposition “All birds have feathers” is necessarily true.”  But Aristotle identifies the syllogistic form with the logical necessity that obtains when two separate propositions necessitate a third.  He defines a sullogismos as “a discourse [logos] in which, certain things being stated, something other than what is stated follows of necessity from them.” (Prior Analytics, I.1.24b18-20, Jenkinson.)  The emphasis here is on the sense of inevitable consequence that precipitates a conclusion when certain forms of propositions are added together.  Indeed, the original Greek term for syllogism is more rigorously translated as “deduction.”  In the Prior Analytics, Aristotle’s method is exploratory.  He searches for pairs of propositions that combine to produce a necessary conclusion.  He begins by accepting that a few syllogisms are self-evidently (or transparently) true.  Barbara, AAA-Fig.1, discussed above, is the best example of this kind of “perfect syllogism.”  Another example of a perfect syllogism is Celarent: EAE-Fig.1.  On seeing the arrangement of terms in such cases, one immediately understands that the conclusion follows necessarily from the premises.  In the case of imperfect syllogisms Aristotle relies on a method of proof that translates them, step-by-step, into perfect syllogisms through a careful rearrangement of terms.  He does this directly, through conversion, or indirectly, through the relationships of contradiction and contrariety outlined in the square of opposition.  To cite only one very simple example, consider a brief passage in the Prior Analytics (I.5.27a5ff) where Aristotle demonstrates that the propositions “No P are M,” and “All S are M” can be combined to produce a syllogism with the conclusion, “No S are P.”  If “No P are M,” it must follow that “No M are P” (conversion); but “No M are P” combined with the second premise, “All S are M” proves that “No S are P.”  (This is to reduce the imperfect syllogism Cesare to the perfect syllogism Celarent.)  This conversion of an imperfect syllogism into a perfect syllogism demonstrates that the original arrangement of terms is a genuine deduction.  In other cases, Aristotle proves that particular arrangements of terms cannot yield proper syllogisms by showing that, in these instances, true premises lead to obviously false or contradictory conclusions.  Alongside these proofs of logical necessity, Aristotle derives general rules for syllogisms, classifies them according to figure, and so on.

It is important to reiterate that Aristotelian syllogisms are not (primarily) about hypothetical sets, imaginary classes, or purely abstract mathematical entities.  Aristotle believes there are natural groups in the world—species and genera—made up of individual members that share a similar nature, and hence similar properties.   It is this sharing of individual things in a similar nature that makes universal statements possible.  Once we have universal terms, we can make over-arching statements that, when combined, lead inescapably to specific results.  In the most rigorous syllogistic, metaphysical necessity is added to logical necessity to produce an unassailable inference.  Seen in this Aristotelian light, syllogisms can be construed as a vehicle for identifying the deep, immutable natures that make things what they are.

Medieval logicians summarized their understanding of the rationale underlying the syllogism in the so-called dictum de omni et nullo (the maxim of all and none), the principle that whatever is affirmed or denied of a whole must be affirmed or denied of a part (which they alleged derived from a reading of Prior Analytics I.1.24b27-30).  Some contemporary authors have claimed that Aristotelian syllogistic is at least compatible with a deflationary theory of truth, the modern idea that truth-claims about propositions amount to little more than an assertion of the statement itself.  (To say that “S is P” is true, is just to assert “S is P.”)  Perhaps it would be better to say that one can trace the modern preoccupation with validity in formal logic to the distinction between issues of logical necessity and propositional truth implicit in Aristotle.  In Aristotle’s logic, arguments do not take the form: “this state of affairs is true/false,” “this state of affairs is true/false,” therefore this state of affairs is true/false.”  We do not argue “All S is M is true” but merely, “All S is M.”  When it comes to determining validity—that is, when it comes to determining whether we have discovered a true syllogism—the question of the truth or falsity of propositions is pushed aside and attention is focused on an evaluation of the logical connection between premises and conclusion.  Obviously, Aristotle recognizes that ascertaining the material truth of premises is an important part of argument evaluation, but he does not present a “truth-functional” logic.  The concept of a “truth value” does not play any explicit role in his formal analysis the way it does, for example, with modern truth tables.  Mostly, Aristotle wants to know what we can confidently conclude from two presumably true premises; that is, what kind of knowledge can be produced or demonstrated if two given premises are true.

10. Inductive Syllogism

Understanding what Aristotle means by inductive syllogism is a matter of serious scholarly dispute.  Although there is only abbreviated textual evidence to go by, his  account of inductive argument can be supplemented by his ampler account of its rhetorical analogues, argument from analogy and argument from example.  What is clear is that Aristotle thinks of induction (epagoge) as a form of reasoning that begins in the sense perception of particulars and ends in a understanding that can be expressed in a universal proposition (or even a concept).  We pick up mental momentum through a familiarity with particular cases that allows us to arrive at a general understanding of an entire species or genus.  As we discuss below, there are indications that Aristotle views induction, in the first instance, as a manifestation of immediate understanding and not as an argument form.  Nonetheless, in the Prior Analytics II.23 (and 24), he casts inductive reasoning in syllogistic form, illustrating the “syllogism that springs out of induction” (ho ex epagoges sullogismos) by an argument about the longevity of bileless animals.

Relying on old biological ideas, Aristotle argues that we can move from observations about the longevity of individual species of bileless animals (that is, animals with clean-blood) to the universal conclusion that bilelessness is a cause of longevity.  His argument can be paraphrased in modern English: All men, horses, mules, and so forth, are long-lived; all men, horses, mules, and so forth, are bileless animals; therefore, all bileless animals are long-lived.  Although this argument seems, by modern standards, invalid, Aristotle apparently claims that it is a valid deduction.  (Remember that the word “syllogism” means “deduction,” so an “inductive syllogism” is, literally, an “inductive deduction.”)  He uses a technical notion of “convertibility” to formally secure the validity of the argument.  According to this logical rule, terms that cover the same range of cases (because they refer to the same nature) are interchangeable (antistrepho).  They can be substituted for one another.  Aristotle believes that because the logical terms “men, horses, mules, etc” and “bileless animals” refer to the same genus, they are convertible.  If, however, we invert the terms in the proposition “all men, horses, mules, and so forth, are bileless animals” to “all bileless animals are men, horses, mules, and so forth,” we can then rephrase the original argument: All men, horses, mules, and so forth, are long-lived; all bileless animals are men, horses, mules, and so forth; therefore, all bileless animals are long-lived.  This revised induction possesses an obviously valid form (Barbara, discussed above).  Note that Aristotle does not view this inversion of terms as a formal gimmick or trick; he believes that it reflects something metaphysically true about shared natures in the world.  (One could argue that inductive syllogism operates by means of the quantification of the predicate term as well as the subject term of a categorical proposition, but we will not investigate that issue here.)

These passages pose multiple problems of interpretation.  We can only advance a general overview of the most important disagreements here.  We might identify four different interpretations of Aristotle’s account of the inductive syllogism.  (1)  The fact that Aristotle seems to view this as a valid syllogism has led many commentators (such as Ross, McKirahan, Peters) to assume that he is referring to what is known as “perfect induction,” a generalization that is built up from a complete enumeration of particular cases.  The main problem here is that it seems to involve a physical impossibility.  No one could empirically inspect every bileless animal (and/or species) to ascertain that the connection between bilelessness and longevity obtains in every case.  (2) Some commentators combine this first explanation with the further suggestion that the bileless example is a rare case and that Aristotle believes, in line with modern accounts, that most inductions only produce probable belief.  (Cf. Govier’s claim that there is a “tradition going back to Aristotle, which maintains that there are  . . .  only two broad types of argument: deductive arguments which are conclusive, and inductive arguments, which are not.”  (Problems in Argument Analysis, 52.))  One problem with such claims is that they overlook the clear distinction that Aristotle makes between rigorous inductions and rhetorical inductions (which we discuss below).  (3)  Some commentators claim that Aristotle (and the ancients generally) overlooked the inherent tenuousness of the inductive reasoning.  On this account, Empiricists such as Locke and Hume discovered something seriously wrong about induction that escaped the notice of an ancient author like Aristotle.  Philosophers in the modern Anglo-American tradition largely favor this interpretation.  (Cf. Garrett’s and Barbanell’s insistence that “Hume was the first to raise skeptical doubts about inductive reasoning, leaving a puzzle as to why the concerns he highlighted had earlier been so completely overlooked.”  (“Induction,” 172.)  Such allegations do not depend, however, on any close reading of a wealth of relevant passages in the Aristotelian corpus and in ancient philosophy generally.  (4) Finally, a minority contemporary view, growing in prominence, has argued that Aristotle did not conceive of induction as an enumerative process but as a matter of intelligent insight into natures.  (Cf. McCaskey, Biondi, Rijk , Groarke.)  On this account, Aristotle does not mean to suggest that inductive syllogism depends on an empirical inspection of every member of a group but on a universal act of understanding that operates through sense perception.  Aristotelian induction can best be compared to modern notions of abduction or inference to the best explanation.  This non-mathematical account has historical precedents in neo-Platonism, Thomism, Idealism, and in the textbook literature of traditionalist modern logicians that opposed the new formal logic.  This view has been criticized, however, as a form of mere intuitionism dependent on an antiquated metaphysics.

The basic idea that induction is valid will raise eyebrows, no doubt.  It is important to stave off some inevitable criticism before continuing.  Modern accounts of induction, deriving, in large part, from Hume and Locke, display a mania for prediction.  (Hence Hume’s question: how can we know that the future bread we eat will nourish us based on past experience of eating bread?)  But this is not primarily how Aristotle views the problem.  For Aristotle, induction is about understanding natural kinds.  Once we comprehend the nature of something, we will, of course, be able to make predictions about its future properties, but understanding its nature is the key.  In Aristotle’s mind, rigorous induction is valid because it picks out those necessary and essential traits that make something what it is.  To use a very simple example, understanding that all spiders have eight legs—that is, that all undamaged spiders have eight legs—is a matter of knowing something deep about the biological nature that constitutes a spider.  Something that does not have eight legs is not a spider.  (Fruitful analogies might be drawn here to the notion of “a posteriori necessity” countenanced by contemporary logicians such as Hilary Putnam and Saul Kripke or to the “revised” concept of a “natural kind” advanced by authors such as Hilary Kornblith or Brian Ellis.)

It is commonly said that Aristotle sees syllogisms as a device for explaining relationships between groups.  This is, in the main, true.  Still, there has to be some room for a consideration of individuals in logic if we hope to include induction as an essential aspect of reasoning.  As Aristotle explains, induction begins in sense perception and sense perception only has individuals as its object.  Some commentators would limit inductive syllogism to a movement from smaller groups (what Aristotle calls “primitive universals”) to larger groups, but one can only induce a generalization about a smaller group on the basis of a prior observation of individuals that compose that group.  A close reading reveals that Aristotle himself mentions syllogisms dealing with individuals (about the moon, Topics, 78b4ff; about the wall, 78b13ff; about the eclipse, Posterior Analytics, 93a29ff, and so on.)  If we treat individuals as universal terms or as representative of universal classes, this poses no problem for formal analysis.  Collecting observations about one individual or about individuals who belong to a larger group can lead to an accurate generalization.

11. Deduction versus Induction

We cannot fully understand the nature or role of inductive syllogism in Aristotle without situating it with respect to ordinary, “deductive” syllogism.  Aristotle’s distinction between deductive and inductive argument is not precisely equivalent to the modern distinction.  Contemporary authors differentiate between deduction and induction in terms of validity.  (A small group of informal logicians called “Deductivists” dispute this account.)  According a well-worn formula, deductive arguments are valid; inductive arguments are invalid.  The premises in a deductive argument guarantee the truth of the conclusion: if the premises are true, the conclusion must be true.  The premises in an inductive argument provide some degree of support for the conclusion, but it is possible to have true premises and a false conclusion.  Although some commentators attribute such views to Aristotle, this distinction between strict logical necessity and merely probable or plausible reasoning more easily maps onto the distinction Aristotle makes between scientific and rhetorical reasoning (both of which we discuss below).  Aristotle views inductive syllogism as scientific (as opposed to rhetorical) induction and therefore as a more rigorous form of inductive argument.

We can best understand what this amounts to by a careful comparison of a deductive and an inductive syllogism on the same topic.  If we reconstruct, along Aristotelian lines, a deduction on the longevity of bileless animals, the argument would presumably run: All bileless animals are long-lived; all men, horses, mules, and so forth, are bileless animals; therefore, all men, horses, mules, and so forth, are long-lived.  Defining the terms in this syllogism as: Subject Term, S=men, horses, mules, and so forth; Predicate Term, P=long-lived animals; Middle Term, M=bileless animals, we can represent this metaphysically correct inference as:  Major Premise: All M are P.  Minor Premise: All S are M.  Conclusion: Therefore all S are P.  (Barbara.)  As we already have seen, the corresponding induction runs: All men, horses, mules, and so forth, are long-lived; all men, horses, mules, and so forth, are bileless animals; therefore, all bileless animals are long-lived.  Using the same definition of terms, we are left with:  Major Premise: All S are P.  Minor Premise: All S are M (convertible to All M are S).  Conclusion: Therefore, all M are P.  (Converted to Barbara.)  The difference between these two inferences is the difference between deductive and inductive argument in Aristotle.

Clearly, Aristotelian and modern treatments of these issues diverge.  As we have already indicated, in the modern formalism, one automatically defines subject, predicate, and middle terms of a syllogism according to their placement in the argument.  For Aristotle, the terms in a rigorous syllogism have a metaphysical significance as well.  In our correctly formulated deductive-inductive pair, S represents individual species and/or the individuals that make up those species (men, horses, mules, and so forth); M represents the deep nature of these things (bilelessness), and P represents the property that necessarily attaches to that nature (longevity).  Here then is the fundamental difference between Aristotelian deduction and induction in a nutshell.  In deduction, we prove that a property (P) belongs to individual species (S) because it possesses a certain nature (M); in induction, we prove that a property (P) belongs to a nature (M) because it belongs to individual species (S).  Expressed formally, deduction proves that the subject term (S) is associated with a predicate term (P) by means of the middle term (M); induction proves that the middle term (M) is associated with the predicate term (P) by means of the subject term (S).  (Cf. Prior Analytics, II.23.68b31-35.)  Aristotle does not claim that inductive syllogism is invalid but that the terms in an induction have been rearranged.  In deduction, the middle term joins the two extremes (the subject and predicate terms); in induction, one extreme, the subject term, acts as the middle term, joining the true middle term with the other extreme.  This is what Aristotle means when he maintains that in induction one uses a subject term to argue to a middle term.  Formally, with respect to the arrangement of terms, the subject term becomes the “middle term” in the argument.

Aristotle distinguishes then between induction and deduction in three different ways.  First, induction moves from particulars to a universal, whereas deduction moves from a universal to particulars.  The bileless induction moves from particular species to a universal nature; the bileless deduction moves from a universal nature to particular species.  Second, induction moves from observation to language (that is, from sense perception to propositions), whereas deduction moves from language to language (from propositions to a new proposition).  The bileless induction is really a way of demonstrating how observations of bileless animals lead to (propositional) knowledge about longevity; the bileless deduction demonstrates how (propositional) knowledge of a universal nature leads (propositional) knowledge about particular species. Third, induction identifies or explains a nature, whereas deduction applies or demonstrates a nature.  The bileless induction provides an explanation of the nature of particular species: it is of the nature of bileless organisms to possess a long life.  The bileless deduction applies that finding to particular species; once we know that it is of the nature of bileless organisms to possess a long life, we can demonstrate or put on display the property of longevity as it pertains to particular species.

One final point needs clarification.  The logical form of the inductive syllogism, after the convertibility maneuver, is the same as the deductive syllogism.  In this sense, induction and deduction possess the same (final) logical form.  But, of course, in order to successfully perform an induction, one has to know that convertibility is possible, and this requires an act of intelligence which is able to discern the metaphysical realities between things out in the world.  We discuss this issue under non-discursive reasoning below.

12. Science

Aristotle wants to construct a logic that provides a working language for rigorous science as he understands it.  Whereas we have been talking of syllogisms as arguments, Aristotelian science is about explanation.  Admittedly, informal logicians generally distinguish between explanation and argument.  An argument is intended to persuade about a debatable point; an explanation is not intended to persuade so much as to promote understanding.  Aristotle views science as involving logical inferences that move beyond what is disputable to a consideration of what is the case.  Still, the “explanatory” syllogisms used in science possess precisely the same formal structures as “argumentative” syllogisms.  So we might consider them arguments in a wider sense.  For his part, Aristotle relegates eristic reason to the broad field of rhetoric.  He views science, perhaps naively, as a domain of established fact.  The syllogisms used in science are about establishing an explanation from specific cases (induction) and then applying or illustrating this explanation to specific cases (deduction).

The ancient Greek term for science, “episteme,” is not precisely equivalent to its modern counterpart.  In Aristotle’s worldview, science, as the most rigorous sort of discursive knowledge, is opposed to mere opinion (doxa); it is about what is universal and necessary as opposed to what is particular and contingent, and it is theoretical as opposed to practical.  Aristotle believes that knowledge, understood as justified true belief, is most perfectly expressed in a scientific demonstration (apodeixis), also known as an apodeitic or scientific syllogism.  He posits a number of specific requirements for this most rigorous of all deductions.  In order to qualify as a scientific demonstration, a syllogism must possess premises that are “true, primary, immediate, better known than, prior to, and causative of the conclusion.” (Posterior Analytics, I.2.71b20ff, Tredennick.)  It must yield information about a natural kind or a group of individual things.  And it must produce universal knowledge (episteme).  Specialists have disputed the meaning of these individual requirements, but the main message is clear.  Aristotle accepts, as a general rule, that a conclusion in an argument cannot be more authoritative than the premises that led to that conclusion.  We cannot derive better (or more reliable) knowledge from worse (or less reliable) knowledge.  Given that a scientific demonstration is the most rigorous form of knowledge possible, we must start with premises that are utterly basic and as certain as possible, which are “immediately” induced from observation, and which confirm to the necessary structure of the world in a way that is authoritative and absolutely incontrovertible.  This requires a reliance on first principles which we discuss below.

In the best case scenario, Aristotelian science is about finding definitions of species that, according to a somewhat bald formula, identify the genus (the larger natural group) and the differentia (that unique feature that sets the species apart from the larger group).  As Aristotle’s focus on definitions is a bit cramped and less than consistent (he himself spends a great deal of time talking about necessary rather than essential properties), let us broaden his approach to science to focus on ostensible definitions, where an ostensible definition is either a rigorous definition or, more broadly, any properly-formulated phrase that identifies the unique properties of something.  On this looser approach, which is more consistent with Aristotle’s actual practice, to define an entity is to identify the nature, the essential and necessary properties, that make it uniquely what it is.  Suffice it to say that Aristotle’s idealized account of what science entails needs to be expanded to cover a wide range of activities and that fall under what is now known as scientific practice.  What follows is a general sketch of his overall orientation.  (We should point out that Aristotle himself resorts to whatever informal methods seem appropriate when reporting on his own biological investigations without too much concern for any fixed ideal of formal correctness.  He makes no attempt to cast his own scientific conclusions in metaphysically-correct syllogisms.  One could perhaps insist that he uses enthymemes (syllogisms with unstated premises), but mostly, he just seems to record what seems appropriate without any deliberate attempt at correct formalization.  Note that most of Aristotle’s scientific work is “historia,” an earlier stage of observing, fact-collecting, and opinion-reporting that proceeds the principled theorizing of advanced science.)

For Aristotle, even theology is a science insomuch as it deals with universal and necessary principles.  Still, in line with modern attitudes (and in opposition to Plato), Aristotle views sense-perception as the proper route to scientific knowledge.  Our empirical experience of the world yields knowledge through induction.  Aristotle elaborates then an inductive-deductive model of science.  Through careful observation of  particular species, the scientist induces an ostensible definition to explain a nature and then demonstrates the consequences of that nature for particular species.  Consider a specific case.  In the Posterior Analytics (II.16-17.98b32ff, 99a24ff), Aristotle mentions an explanation about why deciduous plants lose their leaves in the winter.  The ancients apparently believed this happens because sap coagulates at the base of the leaf (which is not entirely off the mark).  We can use this ancient example of a botanical explanation to illustrate how the business of Aristotelian science is supposed to operate.  Suppose we are a group of ancient botanists who discover, through empirical inspection, why deciduous plants such as vines and figs lose their leaves.  Following Aristotle's lead, we can cast our discovery in the form of the following inductive syllogism:  “Vine, fig, and so forth, are deciduous.  Vine, fig, and so forth, coagulate sap.  Therefore, all sap-coagulators are deciduous.”  This induction produces the definition of “deciduous.”  (“Deciduous” is the definiendum; sap-coagulation, the definiens; the point being that everything that is a sap-coagulator is deciduous, which might not be the case if we turned it around and said “All deciduous plants are sap-coagulators.”)  But once we have a definition of “deciduous,” we can use it as the first premise in a deduction to demonstrate something about say, the genus “broad-leaved trees.”  We can apply, in other words, what we have learned about deciduous plants in general to the more specific genus of broad-leaved trees.  Our deduction will read:  “All sap-coagulators are deciduous.  All broad-leaved trees are sap-coagulators.  Therefore, all broad-leaved trees are deciduous.”  We can express all this symbolically.  For the induction, where S=vine, fig, and so forth, P=deciduous, M= being a sap-coagulator, the argument is: “All S is P; all S is M (convertible to all M is S); therefore, all M are P (converted to Barbara).  For the deduction, where S=broad-leafed trees, M=being a sap-coagulator, P=deciduous, the argument can be represented: “All M are P; all S is M; therefore, all S is P” (Barbara).  This is then the basic logic of Aristotelian science.

A simple diagram of how science operates follows (Figure 2).

Figure 2

The Inductive-Deductive Method of Aristotelian Science

Aristotle views science as a search for causes (aitia).  In a well-known example about planets not twinkling because they are close to the earth (Posterior Analytics, I.13), he makes an important distinction between knowledge of the fact and knowledge of the reasoned fact. The rigorous scientist aims at knowledge of the reasoned fact which explains why something is the way it is.  In our example, sap-coagulation is the cause of deciduous; deciduous is not the cause of sap-coagulation.  That is why “sap-coagulation” is featured here as the middle term, because it is the cause of the phenomenon being investigated.  The deduction “All sap-coagulators are deciduous; all broad-leaved trees are sap-coagulators; therefore, all broad-leaved trees are deciduous” counts as knowledge of the reasoned fact because it reveals the cause of broad-leafed deciduousness.

Aristotle makes a further distinction between what is more knowable relative to us and what is more knowable by nature (or in itself).  He remarks in the Physics, “The natural way of [inquiry] is to start from the things which are more knowable and obvious to us and proceed towards those which are clearer and more knowable by nature; for the same things are not ‘knowable relatively to us’ and ‘knowable’ without qualification.”  (I.184a15, Hardie, Gaye.)  In science we generally move from the effect to the cause, from what we see and observe around us to the hidden origins of things.  The outward manifestation of the phenomenon of “deciduousness” is more accessible to us because we can see the trees shedding their leaves, but sap-coagulation as an explanatory principle is more knowable in itself because it embodies the cause.  To know about sap-coagulation counts as an advance in knowledge; someone who knows this knows more than someone who only knows that trees shed their leaves in the fall.  Aristotle believes that the job of science is to put on display what best counts as knowledge, even if the resulting theory strays from our immediate perceptions and first concerns.

Jan Lukasiewicz, a modern-day pioneer in term logic, comments that “some queer philosophical prejudices which cannot be explained rationally” made early commentators claim that the major premise in a syllogism (the one with the middle and predicate terms) must be first.  (Aristotle’s Syllogistic, 32.)  But once we view the syllogism within the larger context of Aristotelian logic, it becomes perfectly obvious why these early commentators put the major premise first: because it constitutes the (ostensible) definition; because it contains an explanation of the nature of the thing upon which everything else depends.  The major premise in a scientific deduction is the most important part of the syllogism; it is scientifically prior in that it reveals the cause that motivates the phenomenon.  So it makes sense to place it first.  This was not an irrational prejudice.

13. Non-Discursive Reasoning

The distinction Aristotle draws between discursive knowledge (that is, knowledge through argument) and non-discursive knowledge (that is, knowledge through nous) is akin to the medieval distinction between ratio (argument) and intellectus (direct intellection).  In Aristotelian logic, non-discursive knowledge comes first and provides the starting points upon which discursive or argumentative knowledge depends.  It is hard to know what to call the mental power that gives rise to this type of knowledge in English.  The traditional term “intuition” invites misunderstanding.  When Aristotle claims that there is an immediate sort of knowledge that comes directly from the mind (nous) without discursive argument, he is not suggesting that knowledge can be accessed through vague feelings or hunches.  He is referring to a capacity for intelligent appraisal that might be better described as discernment, comprehension, or insight.  Like his later medieval followers, he views “intuition” as a species of reason; it is not prior to reason or outside of reason, it is—in the highest degree—the activity of reason itself.  (Cf. Posterior Analytics, II. 19; Nicomachean Ethics, IV.6.)

For Aristotle, science is only one manifestation of human intelligence.  He includes, for example, intuition, craft, philosophical wisdom, and moral decision-making along with science in his account of the five intellectual virtues.  (Nicomachean Ethics, VI.3-8.)  When it comes to knowledge-acquisition, however, intuition is primary.  It includes the most basic operations of intelligence, providing the ultimate ground of understanding and inference upon which everything else depends.  Aristotle is a firm empiricist.  He believes that knowledge begins in perception, but he also believes that we need intuition to make sense of perception.  In the Posterior Analytics (II.19.100a3-10), Aristotle posits a sequence of steps in mental development: sense perception produces memory which (in combination with intuition) produces human experience (empeiria), which produces art and science.  Through a widening movement of understanding (really, a non-discursive form of induction), intuition transforms observation and memory so as to produce knowledge (without argument).  This intuitive knowledge is even more reliable than science.  As Aristotle writes in key passages at the end of the Posterior Analytics, “no other kind of thought except intuition is more accurate than scientific knowledge,” and “nothing except intuition can be truer than scientific knowledge.” (100b8ff, Mure, slightly emended.)

Aristotelian intuition supplies the first principles (archai) of human knowledge: concepts, universal propositions, definitions, the laws of logic, the primary principles of the specialized science, and even moral concepts such as the various virtues.  This is why, according to Aristotle, intuition must be viewed as infallible.  We cannot claim that the first principles of human intelligence are dubious and then turn around and use those principles to make authoritative claims about the possibility (or impossibility) of knowledge.  If we begin to doubt intuition, that is, human intelligence at its most fundamental level of operation, we will have to doubt everything else that is built upon this universal foundation: science, philosophy, knowledge, logic, inference, and so forth.  Aristotle never tries to prove first principles.  He acknowledges that when it comes to the origins of human thought, there is a point when one must simply stop asking questions.  As he points out, any attempt at absolute proof would lead to an infinite regress.  In his own words: “It is impossible that there should be demonstration of absolutely everything; there would be an infinite regress, so that there would still be no demonstration.” (Metaphysics, 1006a6ff, Ross.)  Aristotle does make arguments, for example, that meaningful speech presupposes a logical axiom like the principle of non-contradiction, but that is not, strictly speaking, a proof of the principle.

Needless to say, Aristotle’s reliance on intuition has provoked a good deal of scholarly disagreement.  Contemporary commentators such as Joseph Owens, G. L. Owen, and Terrence Irwin have argued that Aristotelian first principles begin in dialectic.  On their influential account, we arrive at first principles through a weaker form of argument that revolves around a consideration of “endoxa,” the proverbial opinions of the many and/or the wise.  Robin Smith (and others) severely criticize their account.  The idea that mere opinion could somehow give rise to rigorous scientific knowledge conflicts with Aristotle’s settled view that less reliable knowledge cannot provide sufficient logical support for the more reliable knowledge.  As we discuss below, endoxa do provide a starting point for dialectical (and ethical) arguments in Aristotle’s system.  They are, in his mind, a potent intellectual resource, a library of stored wisdom and right opinion.  They may include potent expressions of first principles already discovered by other thinkers and previous generations.  But as Aristotle makes clear at the end of the Posterior Analytics and elsewhere, the recognition that something is a first principle depends directly on intuition.  As he reaffirms in the Nicomachean Ethics, “it is intuitive reason that grasps the first principles.”  (VI.6.1141a7, Ross.)

If Irwin and his colleagues seek to limit the role of intuition in Aristotle, authors such as Lambertus Marie de Rijk and D. W. Hamlyn go to an opposite extreme, denying the importance of the inductive syllogism and identifying induction (epagoge) exclusively with intuition.  De Rijk claims that Aristotelian induction is “a pre-argumentation procedure consisting in . . . [a] disclosure [that] does not take place by a formal, discursive inference, but is, as it were, jumped upon by an intuitive act of knowledge.” (Semantics and Ontology, I.2.53, 141-2.) Although this position seems extreme, it seems indisputable that inductive syllogism depends on intuition, for without intuition (understood as intelligent discernment), one could not recognize the convertibility of subject and middle terms (discussed above).  Aristotle also points out that one needs intuition to recognize the (ostensible) definitions so crucial to the practice of Aristotelian science.  We must be able to discern the difference between accidental and necessary or essential properties before coming up with a definition.  This can only come about through some kind of direct (non-discursive) discernment.  Aristotle proposes a method for discovering definitions called division—we are to divide things into smaller and smaller sub-groups—but this method depends wholly on nous.  (Cf. Posterior Analytics, II.13.)  Some modern Empiricist commentators, embarrassed by such mystical-sounding doctrines, warn that this emphasis on non-discursive reasoning collapses into pure rationalism (or Platonism), but this is a caricature.  What Aristotle means by rational “intuition” is not a matter of pure, disembodied thought.  One does not arrive at first principles by closing one’s eyes and retreating from the world (as with Cartesian introspection).  For Aristotle, first principles arise through a vigorous interaction of the empirical with the rational; a combination of rationality and sense experience produces the first seeds of human understanding.

Note that Aristotle believes that there are first principles (koinai archai) that are common to all fields of inquiry, such as the principle of non-contradiction or the law of excluded middle, and that each specialized science has its own first principles.  We may recover these first principles second-hand by a (dialectical) review of authorities.  Or, we can derive them first hand by analysis, by dividing the subject matter we are concerned with into its constituent parts.  At the beginning of the Physics, Aristotle explains, “What is to us plain and obvious at first is rather confused masses, the elements and principles of which become known to us later by analysis. Thus we must advance from generalities to particulars; for it is a whole that is best known to sense-perception, and a generality is a kind of whole, comprehending many things within it, like parts.  . . .  Similarly a child begins by calling all men ‘father,’ and all women ‘mother,’ but later on distinguishes each of them.”  (I.1.184a22-184b14, Hardie, Gaye.)  Just as children learn to distinguish their parents from other human beings, those who successfully study a science learn to distinguish the different natural kinds that make up the whole of a scientific phenomenon.  This precedes the work of induction and deduction already discussed. Once we have the parts (or the aspects), we can reason about them scientifically.

14. Rhetoric

Argumentation theorists (less aptly characterized as informal logicians) have critiqued the ascendancy of formal logic, complaining that the contemporary penchant for symbolic logic leaves one with an abstract mathematics of empty signs that cannot be applied in any useful way to larger issues.  Proponents of formal logic counter that their specialized formalism allows for a degree of precision otherwise not available and that any focus on the substantive meaning or truth of propositions is a distraction from logical issues per se.  We cannot readily fit Aristotle into one camp or the other.  Although he does provide a formal analysis of the syllogism, he intends logic primarily as a means of acquiring true statements about the world.  He also engages in an enthusiastic investigation of less rigorous forms of reasoning included in the study of dialectic and rhetoric.

Understanding precisely what Aristotle means by the term “dialectics” (dialektike) is no easy task.  He seems to view it as the technical study of argument in general or perhaps as a more specialized investigation into argumentative dialogue.  He intends his rhetoric (rhetorike), which he describes as the counterpart to dialectic, as an expansive study of the art of persuasion, particularly as it is directed towards a non-academic public.  Suffice it to say, for our purposes, that Aristotle reserves a place in his logic for a general examination of all arguments, for scientific reasoning, for rhetoric, for debating techniques of various sorts, for jurisprudential pleading, for cross-examination, for moral reasoning, for analysis, and for non-discursive intuition.

Aristotle distinguishes between what I will call, for convenience, rigorous logic and persuasive logic.  Rigorous logic aims at epistē, true belief about what is eternal, necessary, universal, and unchanging.  (Aristotle sometimes qualifies this to include “for the most part” scientific knowledge.)  Persuasive logic aims at acceptable, probable, or convincing belief (what we might call “opinion” instead of knowledge.)  It deals with approximate truth, with endoxa (popular or proverbial opinions), with reasoning that is acceptable to a particular audience, or with claims about accidental properties and contingent events.  Persuasive syllogisms have the same form as rigorous syllogisms but are understood as establishing their conclusions in a weaker manner.  As we have already seen, rigorous logic produces deductive and inductive syllogisms; Aristotle indicates that persuasive logic produces, in a parallel manner, enthymemes, analogies, and examples.  He defines an enthymeme as a deduction “concerned with things which may, generally speaking, be other than they are,” with matters that are “for the most part only generally true,”  or with “probabilities and signs”  (Rhetoric, I.2.1357a, Roberts).  He also mentions that the term “enthymeme” may refer to arguments with missing premises.  (Rhetoric, 1.2.1357a16-22.)  When it comes to induction, Aristotle’s presentation is more complicated, but we can reconstruct what he means in a more straightforward manner.

The persuasive counterpart to the inductive syllogism is the analogy and the example, but the example is really a composite argument formed from first, an analogy and second, an enthymeme.  Some initial confusion is to be expected as Aristotle’s understanding of analogies differs somewhat from contemporary accounts.  In contemporary treatments, analogies depend on a direct object(s)-to-object(s) comparison.  Aristotelian analogy, on the other hand, involves reasoning up to a general principle.  We are to conclude (1) that because individual things of a certain nature X have property z, everything that possesses nature X has property z.  But once we know that every X possesses property z, we can make a deduction (2) that some new example of nature X will also have property z.  Aristotle calls (1), the inductive movement up to the generalization, an analogy (literally, an argument from likeness=ton homoion); he calls (2), the deductive movement down to a new case, an enthymeme; and he considers (1) + (2), the combination of the analogy and the enthymeme together, an example (paradeigma).  He presents the following argument from example in the Rhetoric (I.2.1357b31-1358a1).  Suppose we wish to argue that Dionysus, the ruler, is asking for a bodyguard in order to set himself up as despot.  We can establish this by a two-step process.  First, we can draw a damning analogy between previous cases where rulers asked for a bodyguard and induce a general rule about such practices.  We can insist that Peisistratus, Theagenes, and other known tyrants, were scheming to make themselves despots, that Peisistratus, Theagenes, and other known tyrants also asked for a bodyguard, and that therefore, everyone who asks for a bodyguard is scheming to make themselves dictators.  But once we have established this general rule, we can move on to the second step in our argument, using this conclusion as a premise in an enthymeme.  We can argue that all people asking for a bodyguard are scheming to make themselves despots, that Dionysius is someone asking for a bodyguard, and that therefore, Dionysius must be scheming to make himself despot.  This is not, in Aristotle’s mind, rigorous reasoning.  Nonetheless, we can, in this way, induce probable conclusions and then use them to deduce probable consequences.  Although these arguments are intended to be persuasive or plausible rather than scientific, but the reasoning strategy mimics the inductive-deductive movement of science (without compelling, of course, the same degree of belief).

We should point out that Aristotle does not restrict himself to a consideration of purely formal issues in his discussion of rhetoric.  He famously distinguishes, for example, between three means of persuasion: ethos, pathos, and logos.  As we read, at the beginning of his Rhetoric: “Of the modes of persuasion furnished by the spoken word there are three kinds. . . . [Firstly,] persuasion is achieved by the speaker's personal character when the speech is so spoken as to make us think him credible. . . . Secondly, persuasion may come through the hearers, when the speech stirs their emotions. . . . Thirdly, persuasion is effected through the speech itself when we have proved [the point] by means of the persuasive arguments suitable to the case in question.”  (Rhetoric, I.2.1356a2-21, Roberts.)  Aristotle concludes that effective arguers must (1) understand morality and be able to convince an audience that they themselves are good, trustworthy people worth listening to (ethos); (2) know the general causes of emotion and be able to elicit them from specific audience (pathos); and (3) be able to use logical techniques to make convincing (not necessarily sound) arguments (logos).  Aristotle broaches many other issues we cannot enter into here.  He acknowledges that the goal of rhetoric is persuasion, not truth.  Such techniques may be bent to immoral or dishonest ends.  Nonetheless, he insists that it is in the public interest to provide a comprehensive and systematic survey of the field.

We might mention two other logical devices that have a place in Aristotle’s work: the topos and the aporia.  Unfortunately, Aristotle never explicitly explains what a topos is.  The English word “topic” does not do justice to the original notion, for although Aristotelian topoi may be organized around subject matter, they focus more precisely on recommended strategies for successful arguing.  (The technical term derives from a Greek word referring to a physical location.  Some scholars suggest a link to ancient mnemonic techniques that superimposed lists on familiar physical locations as a memory aid.)  In relevant discussions (in the Topics and the Rhetoric) Aristotle offers helpful advice about finding (or remembering) suitable premises, about verbally out-manoeuvring an opponent, about finding forceful analogies, and so on.  Examples of specific topoi would include discussions about how to argue which is the better of two alternatives, how to substitute terms effectively, how to address issues about genus and property, how to argue about cause and effect, how to conceive of sameness and difference, and so on.  Some commentators suggest that different topoi may have been used in a classroom situation in conjunction with student exercises and standardized texts, or with written lists of endoxa, or even with ready-made arguments that students were expected to memorize.

An aporia is a common device in Greek philosophy.  The Greek word aporia (plural, aporiai) refers to a physical location blocked off by obstacles where there is no way out; by extension, it means, in philosophy, a mental perplexity, an impasse, a paradox or puzzle that stoutly resists solution.  Aristotle famously suggests that philosophers begin with aporiai and complete their task by resolving the apparent paradoxes.  An attentive reader will uncover many aporiai in Aristotle who begins many of his treatises with a diaporia, a survey of the puzzles that occupied previous thinkers.  Note that aporiai cannot be solved through some mechanical rearrangement of symbolic terms.  Solving puzzles requires intelligence and discernment; it requires some creative insight into what is at stake.

15. Fallacies

In a short work entitled Sophistical Refutations, Aristotle introduces a theory of logical fallacies that has been remarkably influential.  His treatment is abbreviated and somewhat obscure, and there is inevitably scholarly disagreement about precise exegesis.  Aristotle thinks of fallacies as instances of specious reasoning; they are not merely errors but hidden errors.  A fallacy is an incorrect reasoning strategy that gives the illusion of being sound or somehow conceals the underlying problem.  Aristotle divides fallacies into two broad categories: those which depend on language (sometimes called verbal fallacies) and those that are independent of language (sometimes called material fallacies).  There is some scholarly disagreement about particular fallacies, but traditional English names and familiar descriptions follow.  Linguistic fallacies include: homonymy (verbal equivocation), ambiguity (amphiboly or grammatical equivocation), composition (confusing parts with a whole), division (confusing a whole with parts), accent (equivocation that arises out of mispronunciation or misplaced emphasis) and figure of speech (ambiguity resulting from the form of an expression).  Independent fallacies include accident (overlooking exceptions), converse accident (hasty generalization or improper qualification), irrelevant conclusion, affirming the consequent (assuming an effect guarantees the presence of one possible cause), begging the question (assuming the point), false cause, and complex question (disguising two or more questions as one).  Logicians, influenced by scholastic logic, often gave these characteristic mistakes Latin names: compositio for composition, divisio for division, secundum quid et simpliciter for converse accident, ignoranti enlenchi for nonrelevant conclusion, and petitio principii for begging the question.

Consider three brief examples of fallacies from Aristotle’s original text.  Aristotle formulates the following amphiboly (which admittedly sounds awkward in English): “I wish that you the enemy may capture.”  (Sophistical Refutations, 4.166a7-8, Pickard-Cambridge.)  Clearly, the grammatical structure of the statement leaves it ambiguous as to whether the speaker is hoping that the enemy or “you” be captured.  In discussing complex question, he supplies the following perplexing example: “Ought one to obey the wise or one’s father?”  (Ibid., 12.173a21.)  Obviously, from a Greek perspective, one ought to obey both.  The problem is that the question has been worded in such a way that anyone who answers will be forced to reject one moral duty in order to embrace the other.  In fact, there are two separate questions here—Should one obey the wise?  Should one obey one’s father?—that have been illegitimately combined to produce a single question with a single answer.  Finally, Aristotle provides the following time-honoured example of affirming the consequent: “Since after the rain the ground is wet, we suppose that if the ground is wet, it has been raining; whereas that does not necessarily follow”  (Ibid., 5.167b5-8.)  Aristotle’s point is that assuming that the same effect never has more than one cause misconstrues the true nature of the world.  The same effect may have several causes.  Many of Aristotle’s examples have to do with verbal tricks which are entirely unconvincing—for example, the person who commits the fallacy of division by arguing that the number “5” is both even and odd because it can be divided into an even and an odd number: “2” and “3.”  (Ibid., 4.166a32-33.)  But the interest here is theoretical: figuring out where an obviously-incorrect argument or proposition went wrong.  We should note that much of this text, which deals with natural language argumentation, does not presuppose the syllogistic form.  Aristotle does spend a good bit of time considering how fallacies are related to one another.  Fallacy theory, it is worth adding, is a thriving area of research in contemporary argumentation theory.  Some of these issues are hotly debated.

16. Moral Reasoning

In the modern world, many philosophers have argued that morality is a matter of feelings, not reason.  Although Aristotle recognizes the connative (or emotional) side of morality, he takes a decidedly different tack.  As a virtue ethicist, he does not focus on moral law but views morality through the lens of character.  An ethical person develops a capacity for habitual decision-making that aims at good, reliable traits such as honesty, generosity, high-mindedness, and courage.  To modern ears, this may not sound like reason-at-work, but Aristotle argues that only human beings—that is, rational animals—are able to tell the difference between right and wrong.  He widens his account of rationality to include a notion of practical wisdom (phronesis), which he defines as “a true and reasoned state of capacity to act with regard to the things that are good or bad for man.”  (Nicomachean Ethics, VI.5.1140b4-5, Ross, Urmson).  The operation of practical wisdom, which is more about doing than thinking, displays an inductive-deductive pattern similar to science as represented in Figure 3.  It depends crucially on intuition or nous.  One induces the idea of specific virtues (largely, through an exercise of non-discursive reason) and then deduces how to apply these ideas to particular circumstances.  (Some scholars make a strict distinction between “virtue” (areté) understood as the mental capacity which induces moral ideas and “phronesis” understood as the mental capacity which applies these ideas, but the basic structure of moral thinking remains the same however strictly or loosely we define these two terms.)

Figure 3

The Inductive-Deductive Method of Aristotelian Ethics

We can distinguish then between moral induction and moral deduction.  In moral induction, we induce an idea of courage, honesty, loyalty, and so on.  We do this over time, beginning in our childhood, through habit and upbringing.  Aristotle writes that the successful moral agent “must be born with an eye, as it were, by which to judge rightly and choose what is truly good.”  (Ibid., VI.7.1114b6ff.)  Once this intuitive capacity for moral discernment has been sufficiently developed—once the moral eye is able to see the difference between right and wrong,—we can apply moral norms to the concrete circumstances of our own lives.  In moral deduction, we go on to apply the idea of a specific virtue to a particular situation.  We do not do this by formulating moral arguments inside our heads, but by making reasonable decisions, by doing what is morally required given the circumstances.  Aristotle refers, in this connection, to the practical syllogism which results “in a conclusion which is an action.” (Movement of Animals, 701a10ff, Farquharson.)  Consider a (somewhat simplified) example.   Suppose I induce the idea of promise-keeping as a virtue and then apply it to question of whether I should pay back the money I borrowed from my brother.  The corresponding theoretical syllogism would be:  Promise-keeping is good; giving back the money I owe my brother is an instance of promise-keeping; so giving the back the money I owe my brother is good.”  In the corresponding practical syllogism, I do not conclude with a statement:  “this act is good.”  I go out and pay back the money I owe my brother.  The physical exchange of money counts as the conclusion.  In Aristotle’s moral system, general moral principles play the role of an ostensible definition in science.  One induces a general principle and deduces a corresponding action.  Aristotle does believe that moral reasoning is a less rigorous form of reasoning than science, but chiefly because scientific demonstrations deal with universals whereas the practical syllogism ends a single act that must be fitted to contingent circumstances.  There is never any suggestion that morality is somehow arbitrary or subjective.  One could set out the moral reasoning process using the moral equivalent of an inductive syllogism and a scientific demonstration.

Although Aristotle provides a logical blueprint for the kind of reasoning that is going on in ethical decision-making, he obviously does not view moral decision-making as any kind of mechanical or algorithmic procedure.  Moral induction and deduction represent, in simplified form, what is going on.  Throughout his ethics, Aristotle emphasizes the importance of context.  The practice of morality depends then on a faculty of keen discernment that notices, distinguishes, analyzes, appreciates, generalizes, evaluates, and ultimately decides.  In the Nicomachean Ethics, he includes practical wisdom in his list of five intellectual virtues.  (Scholarly commentators variously explicate the relationship between the moral and the intellectual virtues.)  Aristotle also discusses minor moral virtues such as good deliberation (eubulia), theoretical moral understanding (sunesis), and experienced moral judgement (gnome).  And he equates moral failure with chronic ignorance or, in the case of weakness of will (akrasia), with intermittent ignorance.

17. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Complete Works of Aristotle.  Edited by Jonathan Barnes.  Princeton, N.J.: Princeton University Press, 1984.
    • The standard scholarly collection of translations.
  • Aristotle in 23 Volumes.  Cambridge, M.A.: Harvard University Press; London: William Heinemann Ltd., 1944 and 1960.
    • A scholarly, bilingual edition.

b. Secondary Sources

This list is intended as a window on a diversity of approaches and problems.

  • Barnes, Jonathan, (Aristotle) Posterior Analytics. Oxford: Clarendon Press; New York : Oxford University Press, 1994.
  • Biondi, Paolo.  Aristotle: Posterior Analytics II.19.  Quebec, Q.C.: Les Presses de l’Universite Laval, 2004.
  • Ebbesen, Sten, Commentators and Commentaries on Aristotle’s Sophistici Elenchi, Vol. 1: The Greek Tradition. Leiden: Brill, 1981.
  • Engberg-Pedersen, Troels.  “More on Aristotelian Epagoge.” Phronesis, 24 (1979): 301-319.
  • Englebretsen, George.  Three Logicians: Aristotle, Leibnitz, and Sommers and the Syllogistic.  Assen, Netherlands: Van Gorcum, 1981.
    • See also Sommers, below.
  • Garrett, Dan, and Edward Barbanell.  Encyclopedia of Empiricism. Westport, Conn.: Greenwood Press, 1997.
  • Govier, Trudy.  Problems in Argument Analysis and Evaluation.  Providence, R.I.: Floris, 1987.
  • Groarke, Louis. “A Deductive Account of Induction,” Science et Esprit, 52 (December 2000), 353-369.
  • Groarke, Louis. An Aristotelian Account of Induction: Creating Something From Nothing.  Montreal & Kingston: McGill-Queen’s University Press, 2009.
  • Hamlyn, D. W.  Aristotle’s De Anima Books II and III.  Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1974.
  • Hamlyn, D. W. “Aristotelian Epagoge.”  Phronesis 21 (1976): 167-184.
  • Irwin, Terence.  Aristotle’s First Principles.  Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1988.
  • Keyt, David.  “Deductive Logic,” in A Companion to Aristotle, George Anaganostopoulos, London: Blackwell, 2009, pp. 31-50.
  • Łukasiewicz, Jan.  Aristotle's Syllogistic from the Standpoint of Modern Formal Logic. Oxford University Press, 1957.
  • McCaskey, John, “Freeing Aristotelian Epagôgê from Prior Analytics II 23,” Apeiron, 40:4 (December, 2007), pp. 345–74.
  • McKirahan, Richard Jr.  Principles and Proofs: Aristotle’s Theory of Demonstrative Species.  Princeton, N.J.: Princeton University Press, 1992.
  • Parry, William, and Edward Hacker. Aristotelian Logic. Albany, NY: State University of New York Press, 1991.
  • Peters, F. E., Greek Philosophical Terms: A Historical Lexicon.  New York: NYU Press, 1967.
  • Rijk, Lambertus Marie de.  Aristotle: Semantics and Ontology.  Boston, M.A.: Brill, 2002.
  • Smith, Robin.  “Aristotle on the Uses of Dialectic,” Synthese , Vol. 96, No. 3, 1993, 335-358.
  • Smith, Robin. Aristotle, Prior Analytics.  Indianapolis, IN: Hackett, 1989.
  • Smith, Robin. “Aristotle’s Logic,” Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy. E, Zalta. ed. Stanford, CA., 2000, 2007.
    • An excellent introduction to Aristotle’s logic (with a different focus).
  • Smith, Robin. “Aristotle’s Theory of Demonstration,” in A Companion to Aristotle, 52-65.
  • Sommers, Fred, and George Englebretsen, An Invitation to Formal Reasoning: The Logic of Terms. Aldershot UK: Ashgate, 2000.


Author Information

Louis F. Groarke
St. Francis Xavier University

Frantz Fanon (1925—1961)

FrantzfanonpjwproductionsFrantz Fanon was one of a few extraordinary thinkers supporting the decolonization struggles occurring after World War II, and he remains among the most widely read and influential of these voices.  His brief life was notable both for his whole-hearted engagement in the independence struggle the Algerian people waged against France and for his astute, passionate analyses of the human impulse towards freedom in the colonial context.  His written works have become central texts in Africana thought, in large part because of their attention to the roles hybridity and creolization can play in forming humanist, anti-colonial cultures.  Hybridity, in particular, is seen as a counter-hegemonic opposition to colonial practices, a non-assimilationist way of building connections across cultures that Africana scholar Paget Henry argues is constitutive of Africana political philosophy.

Tracing the development of his writings helps explain how and why he has become an inspirational figure firing the moral imagination of people who continue to work for social justice for the marginalized and the oppressed.  Fanon’s first work Peau Noire, Masques Blancs (Black Skin, White Masks) was his first effort to articulate a radical anti-racist humanism that adhered neither to assimilation to a white-supremacist mainstream nor to reactionary philosophies of black superiority.  While the attention to oppression of colonized peoples that was to dominate his later works was present in this first book, its call for a new understanding of humanity was undertaken from the subject-position of a relatively privileged Martinican citizen of France, in search of his own place in the world as a black man from the French Caribbean, living in France.  His later works, notably L’An Cinq, de la Révolution Algérienne (A Dying Colonialism) and the much more well-known Les Damnés de la Terre (The Wretched of the Earth), go beyond a preoccupation with Europe’s pretensions to being a universal standard of culture and civilization, in order to take on the struggles and take up the consciousness of the colonized “natives” as they rise up and reclaim simultaneously their lands and their human dignity.  It is Fanon’s expansive conception of humanity and his decision to craft the moral core of decolonization theory as a commitment to the individual human dignity of each member of populations typically dismissed as “the masses” that stands as his enduring legacy.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Africana Phenomenology
  3. Decolonization Theory
  4. Influences on Fanon’s Thought
  5. Movements and Thinkers Influenced by Fanon
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Biography

Frantz Fanon was born in the French colony of Martinique on July 20, 1925.  His family occupied a social position within Martinican society that could reasonably qualify them as part of the black bourgeoisie; Frantz’s father, Casimir Fanon, was a customs inspector and his mother, Eléanore Médélice, owned a hardware store in downtown Fort-de-France, the capital of Martinique.  Members of this social stratum tended to strive for assimilation, and identification, with white French culture.  Fanon was raised in this environment, learning France’s history as his own, until his high school years when he first encountered the philosophy of negritude, taught to him by Aimé Césaire, Martinique’s other renowned critic of European colonization.  Politicized, and torn between the assimilationism of Martinique’s middle class and the preoccupation with racial identity that negritude promotes, Fanon left the colony in 1943, at the age of 18, to fight with the Free French forces in the waning days of World War II.

After the war, he stayed in France to study psychiatry and medicine at university in Lyons.  Here, he encountered bafflingly simplistic anti-black racism—so different from the complex, class-permeated distinctions of shades of lightness and darkness one finds in the Caribbean—which would so enrage him that he was inspired to write “An Essay for the Disalienation of Blacks,” the piece of writing that would eventually become Peau Noire, Masques Blancs (1952).  It was here too that he began to explore the Marxist and existentialist ideas that would inform the radical departure from the assimilation-negritude dichotomy that Peau Noire’s anti-racist humanism inaugurates.

Although he briefly returned to the Caribbean after he finished his studies, he no longer felt at home there and in 1953, after a stint in Paris, he accepted a position as chef de service (chief of staff) for the psychiatric ward of the Blida-Joinville hospital in Algeria.  The following year, 1954, marked the eruption of the Algerian war of independence against France, an uprising directed by the Front de Libération Nationale (FLN) and brutally repressed by French armed forces.  Working in a French hospital, Fanon was increasingly responsible for treating both the psychological distress of the soldiers and officers of the French army who carried out torture in order to suppress anti-colonial resistance and the trauma suffered by the Algerian torture victims.  Already alienated by the homogenizing effects of French imperialism, by 1956 Fanon realized he could not continue to aid French efforts to put down a decolonization movement that commanded his political loyalties, and he resigned his position at the hospital.

Once he was no longer officially working for the French government in Algeria, Fanon was free to devote himself to the cause of Algerian independence.  During this period, he was based primarily in Tunisia where he trained nurses for the FLN, edited its newspaper el Moujahid, and contributed articles about the movement to sympathetic publications, including Presence Africaine and Jean-Paul Sartre’s journal Les Temps Modernes.  Some of Fanon’s writings from this period were published posthumously in 1964 as Pour la Révolution Africaine (Toward the African Revolution).  In 1959 Fanon published a series of essays, L’An Cinq, de la Révolution Algérienne, (The Year of the Algerian Revolution) which detail how the oppressed natives of Algeria organized themselves into a revolutionary fighting force.  That same year, he took up a diplomatic post in the provisional Algerian government, ambassador to Ghana, and used the influence of this position to help open up supply routes for the Algerian army.  It was in Ghana that Fanon was diagnosed with the leukemia that would be his cause of death.  Despite his rapidly failing health, Fanon spent ten months of his last year of life writing the book for which he would be most remembered, Les Damnés de la Terre, an indictment of the violence and savagery of colonialism which he ends with a passionate call for a new history of humanity to be initiated by a decolonized Third World.  In October 1961, Fanon was brought to the United States by a C.I.A. agent so that he could receive treatment at a National Institutes of Health facility in Bethesda, Maryland.  He died two months later, on December 6, 1961, reportedly still preoccupied with the cause of liberty and justice for the peoples of the Third World. At the request of the FLN, his body was returned to Tunisia, where it was subsequently transported across the border and buried in the soil of the Algerian nation for which he fought so single-mindedly during the last five years of his life.

2. Africana Phenomenology

Fanon’s contribution to phenomenology, glossed as a critical race discourse (an analysis of the pre-conscious forces shaping the self that organizes itself around race as a founding category), most particularly his exploration of the existential challenges faced by black human beings in a social world that is constituted for white human beings, receives its most explicit treatment in Peau Noire, Masques Blancs.  The central metaphor of this book, that black people must wear “white masks” in order to get by in a white world, is reminiscent of W.E.B. Du Bois’ argument that African Americans develop a double consciousness living under a white power structure: one that flatters that structure (or some such) and one experienced when among other African Americans.  Fanon’s treatment of the ways black people respond to a social context that racializes them at the expense of our shared humanity ranges across a broader range of cultures than Du Bois, however; Fanon examines how race shapes (deforms) the lives of both men and women in the French Caribbean, in France, and in colonial conflicts in Africa.  Africana sociologist Paget Henry characterizes Fanon’s relation to Du Bois in the realm of phenomenology as one of extension and of clarification, since he offers a more detailed investigation of how the self encounters the trauma of being categorized by others as inferior due to an imposed racial identity and how that self can recuperate a sense of identity and a cultural affiliation that is independent of the racist project of an imperializing dominant culture.

Fanon dissects in all of his major works the racist and colonizing project of white European culture, that is, the totalizing, hierarchical worldview that needs to set up the black human being as “negro” so it has an “other” against which to define itself.  While Peau Noire offers a sustained discussion of the psychological dimensions of this “negrification” of human beings and possibilities of resistance to it, the political dimensions are explored in L’An Cinq, de la Révolution Algérienne and Les Damnés de la Terre.  Fanon’s diagnosis of the psychological dimensions of negrification’s phenomenological violence documents its traumatizing effects: first, negrification promotes negative attitudes toward other blacks and Africa; second, it normalizes attitudes of desire and debasement toward Europe, white people, and white culture in general; and finally, it presents itself as such an all-encompassing way of being in the world that no other alternative appears to be possible.  The difficulty of overcoming the sense of alienation that negrification sets up as necessary for the black human being lies in learning to see oneself not just as envisioned and valued (that is, devalued) by the white dominant culture but simultaneously through a perspective constructed both in opposition to and independently from the racist/racialized mainstream, a parallel perspective in which a black man or woman’s value judgments—of oneself and of others of one’s race—do not have to be filtered through white norms and values.  It is only through development of this latter perspective that the black man or woman can shake off the psychological colonization that racist phenomenology imposes, Fanon argues.

One of the most pervasive agents of phenomenological conditioning is language.  In Peau Noire, Fanon analyzes language as that which carries and reveals racism in culture, using as an example the symbolism of whiteness and blackness in the French language—a point that translates equally well into English linguistic habits.  One cannot learn and speak this language, Fanon asserts, without subconsciously accepting the cultural meanings embedded in equations of purity with whiteness and malevolence with blackness: to be white is to be good, and to be black is to be bad.  While Peau Noire focuses on the colonizing aspects of the French language, L’An Cinq, on the other hand, offers an interesting account of how language might enable decolonization efforts.  Fanon describes a decision made by the revolutionary forces in Algeria in 1956 to give up their previous boycott of French and instead start using it as the lingua franca that could unite diverse communities of resistance, including those who did not speak Arabic.  The subversive effects of adopting French extended beyond the convenience of a common language; it also cast doubt on the simplistic assumption the French colonizers had been making, namely, that all French speakers in Algeria were loyal to the colonial government.  After strategically adopting the colonizer’s language, one entered a shop or a government office no longer necessarily announcing one’s politics in one’s choice of language.

Fanon’s critical race phenomenology is not without its critics, many of whom read Peau Noire’s back-to-back accounts of the black woman’s desire for a white lover and the black man’s desire for a white lover as misogynistic.  According to these critiques, typically offered from a feminist point of view, the autobiography of Mayotte Capécia, a Martinican woman who seeks the love of a white man, any white man it seems, is treated by Fanon (who describes it as “cut-rate” and “ridiculous”) with far less respect than the novel by René Maran, which describes the story of Jean Veneuse, a black man who reluctantly falls in love with a white Frenchwoman and hesitates to marry her until he is urged to do so by her brother.  Although Fanon is unequivocal in his statement that both of these discussions serve as examples of “alienated psyches,” white feminists who make this charge of misogyny point to his less sympathetic account of Capécia as evidence that he holds black women complicit in the devaluing of blackness.  Where it is found at all in the work of black feminist writers, this allegation tends to be more tentative, and tends to be contextualized within a pluralist inventory of phenomenological approaches.  Just as Fanon selects race as the founding category of phenomenology, a feminist phenomenology would focus on gender as a founding category.  In this pluralist framework, Fanon’s attention to race at the expense of gender is arguably more explicable as a methodological choice than a deep-seated contempt for women.

3. Decolonization Theory

The political dimensions of negrification that call for decolonization receive fuller treatment in L’An Cinq, de la Révolution Algérienne and Les Damnés de la Terre.  But Fanon does not simply diagnose the political symptoms of the worldview within which black men and women are dehumanized.  He situates his diagnosis within an unambiguous ethical commitment to the equal right of every human being to have his or her human dignity recognized by others.  This assertion, that all of us are entitled to moral consideration and that no one is dispensable, is the principled core of his decolonization theory, which continues to inspire scholars and activists dedicated to human rights and social justice.

As the French title suggests, L’An Cinq (published in English as A Dying Colonialism) is Fanon’s first-hand account of how the Algerian people mobilized themselves into a revolutionary fighting force and repelled the French colonial government.  The lessons that other aspiring revolutionary movements can learn from Fanon’s presentation of the FLN’s strategies and tactics are embedded in their particular Algerian context, but nonetheless evidently adaptable.  In addition to describing the FLN’s strategic adoption of French as the language of communication with its sympathetic civilian population, Fanon also traces the interplay of ideological and pragmatic choices they made about communications technology.  Once the French started suppressing newspapers, the FLN had to rethink their standing boycott of radios, which they had previously denounced as the colonizer’s technology.  This led to the creation of a nationalist radio station, the Voice of Fighting Algeria, that now challenged colonial propaganda with what Fanon described as “the first words of the nation.”  Another of the fundamental challenges they issued to the colonial world of division and hierarchy was the radically inclusive statement the provisional government made that all people living in Algeria would be considered citizens of the new nation.  This was a bold contestation of European imperialism on the model of Haiti’s first constitution (1805), which attempted to break down hierarchies of social privilege based on skin color by declaring that all Haitian citizens would be considered black.  Both the Algerian and Haitian declarations are powerful decolonizing moves because they undermine the very Manichean structure that Fanon identifies as the foundation of the colonial world.

While L’An Cinq offers the kinds of insights one might hope for from a historical document, Les Damnés de la Terre is a more abstract analysis of colonialism and revolution.  It has been described as a handbook for black revolution.  The book ranges over the necessary role Fanon thinks violence must play in decolonization struggles, the false paths decolonizing nations take when they entrust their eventual freedom to negotiations between a native elite class and the formers colonizers instead of mobilizing the masses as a popular fighting force, the need to recreate a national culture through a revolutionary arts and literature movement, and an inventory of the psychiatric disorders that colonial repression unleashes.  Part of its shocking quality, from a philosophical perspective, is alluded to in the preface that Jean-Paul Sartre wrote for the book: it speaks the language of philosophy and deploys the kind of Marxist and Hegelian arguments one might expect in a philosophy of liberation, but it does not speak to the West.  It is Fanon conversing with, advising, his fellow Third-World revolutionaries.

The controversy that swirls around Les Damnés is very different from the one Peau Noire attracts.  Where feminist critiques of Peau Noire require a deep reading and an analysis of the kinds of questions Fanon failed to ask, those who find fault with Les Damnés for what they see as its endorsement of violent insurgency are often reading Fanon’s words too simplistically.   His argument is not that decolonizing natives are justified in using violent means to effect their ends;  the point he is making in his opening chapter, “Concerning Violence,” is that violence is a fundamental element of colonization, introduced by the colonizers and visited upon the colonized as part of the colonial oppression.  The choice concerning violence that the colonized native must make, in Fanon’s view, is between continuing to accept it—absorbing the abuse or displacing it upon other members of the oppressed native community—or taking this foreign violence and throwing it back in the face of those who initiated it.  Fanon’s consistent existentialist commitment to choosing one’s character through one’s actions means that decolonization can only happen when the native takes up his or her responsible subjecthood and refuses to occupy the position of violence-absorbing passive victim.

4. Influences on Fanon’s Thought

The first significant influence on Fanon was the philosophy of negritude to which he was introduced by Aimé Césaire.  Although this philosophy of black pride was a potent counterbalance to the assimilation tendencies into which Fanon had been socialized, it was ultimately an inadequate response to an imperializing culture that presents itself as a universal worldview.  Far more fruitful, in Fanon’s view, were his studies in France of Hegel, Marx, and Husserl.  From these sources he developed the view that dialectic could be the process through which the othered/alienated self can respond to racist trauma in a healthy way, a sensitivity to the social and economic forces that shape human beings, and an appreciation for the pre-conscious construction of self that phenomenology can reveal.  He also found Sartre’s existentialism a helpful resource for theorizing the process of self construction by which each of us chooses to become the persons we are.  This relation with Sartre appears to have been particularly mutually beneficial; Sartre’s existentialism permeates Peau Noire and in turn, Sartre’s heartfelt and radical commitment to decolonization suggests that Fanon had quite an influence on him.

5. Movements and Thinkers Influenced by Fanon

The pan-Africanism that Fanon understood himself to be contributing to in his work on behalf of Third World peoples never really materialized as a political movement.  It must be remembered that in Fanon’s day, the term “Third World” did not have the meaning it has today.  Where today it designates a collection of desperately poor countries that are the objects of the developed world’s charity, in the 1950s and 1960s, the term indicated the hope of an emerging alternative to political alliance with either the First World (the United States and Europe) or the Second World (the Soviet bloc).  The attempt to generate political solidarity and meaningful political power among the newly independent nations of Africa instead foundered as these former colonies fell victim to precisely the sort of false decolonization and client-statism that Fanon had warned against.  Today, as a political program, that ideal of small-state solidarity survives only in the leftist critiques of neoliberalism offered by activists like Noam Chomsky and Naomi Klein.

Instead, the discourse of solidarity and political reconstruction has retreated into the academy, where it is theorized as “postcolonialism.”  Here we find the critical theorizing of scholars like Edward Said and Gayatri Spivak, both of whom construct analyses of the colonial Self and the colonized Other that, implicitly at least, depend on the Manichean division that Fanon presents in Les Damnés.

Thinkers around the globe have been profoundly influenced by Fanon’s work on anti-black racism and decolonization theory.  Brazilian theorist of critical pedagogy Paulo Freire engages Fanon in dialogue in Pedagogy of the Oppressed, notably in his discussion of the mis-steps that oppressed people may make on their path to liberation.  Freire’s emphasis on the need to go beyond a mere turning of the tables, a seizure of the privileges and social positions of the oppressors, echoes Fanon’s concern in Les Damnés and in essays such as “Racism and Culture” (in Pour la Révolution Africaine) that failure to appreciate the deeply Manichean structure of the settler-native division could lead to a false decolonization in which a native elite simply replace the settler elite as the oppressive rulers of the still exploited masses.  This shared concern is the motivation for Freire’s insistence on perspectival transformation and on populist inclusion as necessary conditions for social liberation.

Kenyan author and decolonization activist Ngũgĩ wa Thiong’o also draws on ideas Fanon presents in Les Damnés.  Inspired mainly by Fanon’s meditations on the need to decolonize national consciousness, Ngũgĩ has written of the need to get beyond the “colonization of the mind” that occurs in using the language of imposed powers.  Like Fanon, he recognizes that language has a dual character.  It colonizes in the sense that power congeals in the history of how language is used (that is, its role in carrying culture). But it can also be adapted to our real-life communication and our “image-forming” projects, which means it also always carries the potential to be the means by which we liberate ourselves.  Ngũgĩ’s last book in English, Decolonizing the Mind, was his official renunciation of the colonizer’s language in favor of his native tongue, Gĩkũyũ, and its account of the politics of language in African literature can fruitfully be read as an illustration of the abstract claims Fanon makes about art and culture in Les Damnés and Pour la Révolution Africaine.

Maori scholar Linda Tuhiwai Smith takes up Fanon’s call for artists and intellectuals of decolonizing societies to create new literatures and new cultures for their liberated nations.  Applying Fanon’s call to her own context, Tuhiwai Smith notes that Maori writers in New Zealand have begun to produce literature that reflects and supports a resurgent indigenous sovereignty movement, but she notes that there is little attention to achieving that same intellectual autonomy in the social sciences.  Inspired by Fanon’s call to voice, she has written Decolonizing Methodologies, a book that interrogates the way “research” has been used by European colonial powers to subjugate indigenous peoples and also lays out methodological principles for indigenous research agendas that will not reproduce the same dehumanizing results that colonial knowledge production has been responsible for

In the United States, Fanon’s influence continues to grow.  Feminist theorist bell hooks, one of those who notes the absence of attention to gender in Fanon’s work, nonetheless acknowledges the power of his vision of the resistant decolonized subject and the possibility of love that this vision nurtures.  Existential phenomenologist Lewis R. Gordon works to articulate the new humanism that Fanon identified as the goal of a decolonized anti-racist philosophy.  Gordon is one of the Africana--and Caribbean--focused scholars in American academia who has been involved in founding today’s most prominent Africana-Caribbean research network, the Caribbean Philosophical Association, which awards an annual book prize in Frantz Fanon’s name.  The Frantz Fanon Prize recognizes excellence in scholarship that advances Caribbean philosophy and Africana-humanist thought in the Fanonian tradition.

In Paris, the heart of the former empire that Fanon opposed so vigorously in his short life, his philosophy of humanist liberation and his commitment to the moral relevance of all people everywhere have been taken up by his daughter Mireille Fanon.  She heads the Fondation Frantz Fanon and follows in her father’s footsteps with her work on questions of international law and human rights, supporting the rights of migrants, and championing struggles against the impunity of the powerful and all forms of racism.


6. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Fanon, Frantz.  L’An Cinq, de la Révolution Algérienne.  Paris: François Maspero, 1959.  [Published in English as A Dying Colonialism, trans. Haakon Chevalier (New York: Grove Press, 1965).]
  • Fanon, Frantz.  Les Damnés de la Terre.  Paris: François Maspero, 1961.  [Published in English as The Wretched of the Earth, trans. Constance Farrington (New York: Grove Press, 1965).]
  • Fanon, Frantz.  Peau Noire, Masques Blancs.  Paris: Editions du Seuil, 1952.  [Published in English as Black Skin, White Masks, trans. Charles Lam Markmann (New York: Grove Press, 1967).]
  • Fanon, Frantz.  Pour la Révolution Africaine.  Paris: François Maspero, 1964.  [Published in English as Toward the African Revolution, trans. Haakon Chevalier (New York: Grove Press, 1967).]

b. Secondary Sources

  • Cherki, Alice.  Frantz Fanon: A Portrait.  Trans. Nadia Benabid.  Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press, 2006.
    • A biography of Fanon by one of his co-workers at the Blida-Joinville hospital in Algeria and fellow activists for Algerian liberation.
  • Gibson, Nigel C.  Fanon: The Postcolonial Imagination.  Cambridge, UK: Polity Press, 2003.
    • An introduction to Fanon’s ideas with emphasis on the role that dialectic played in his development of a philosophy of liberation.
  • Gibson, Nigel C. (ed.).  Rethinking Fanon: The Continuing Dialogue.  Amherst, NY: Humanity Books, 1999.
    • A collection of some of the enduring essays on Fanon, with attention to his continuing relevance.
  • Gordon, Lewis R.  Fanon and the Crisis of European Man: An Essay on Philosophy and the Human Sciences.  New York: Routledge, 1995.
    • An argument in the Fanonian vein that bad faith in European practice of the human sciences has impeded the inclusive humanism Fanon called for.
  • Gordon, Lewis R., T. Denean Sharpley-Whiting, and Renée T. White (eds.).  Fanon: A Critical Reader.  Malden, MA: Blackwell, 1996.
    • Essays on Africana philosophy, neocolonial and postcolonial studies, human sciences, and other academic discourses that place Fanon’s work in its appropriate and illuminating contexts.
  • Hoppe, Elizabeth A. and Tracey Nicholls (eds.).  Fanon and the Decolonization of Philosophy.  Lanham, MD: Lexington Books, 2010.
    • Essays by contemporary Fanon scholars exploring the enduring relevance to philosophy of Fanon’s thought.
  • Sekyi-Out, Ato.  Fanon’s Dialectic of Experience.  Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1996.
    • A hermeneutic reading of all of Fanon’s texts as a single dialectical narrative.
  • Zahar, Renate.  Frantz Fanon: Colonialism and Alienation.  New York: Monthly Review Press, 1974.
    • An analysis of Fanon’s writings through the concept of alienation.


Author Information

Tracey Nicholls
Lewis University
U. S. A.

Edmund Husserl (1859—1938)

HusserlAlthough not the first to coin the term, it is uncontroversial to suggest that the German philosopher, Edmund Husserl (1859-1938), is the "father" of the philosophical movement known as phenomenology.  Phenomenology can be roughly described as the sustained attempt to describe experiences (and the "things themselves") without metaphysical and theoretical speculations. Husserl suggested that only by suspending or bracketing away the "natural attitude" could philosophy becomes its own distinctive and rigorous science, and he insisted that phenomenology is a science of consciousness rather than of empirical things. Indeed, in Husserl’s hands phenomenology began as a critique of both psychologism and naturalism.  Naturalism is the thesis that everything belongs to the world of nature and can be studied by the methods appropriate to studying that world (that is, the methods of the hard sciences). Husserl argued that the study of consciousness must actually be very different from the study of nature. For him, phenomenology does not proceed from the collection of large amounts of data and to a general theory beyond the data itself, as in the scientific method of induction. Rather, it aims to look at particular examples without theoretical presuppositions (such as the phenomena of intentionality, of love, of two hands touching each other, and so forth), before then discerning what is essential and necessary to these experiences. Although all of the key, subsequent phenomenologists (Heidegger, Sartre, Merleau-Ponty, Gadamer, Levinas, Derrida) have contested aspects of Husserl’s characterization of phenomenology, they have nonetheless been heavily indebted to him. As such, he is arguably one of the most important and influential philosophers of the twentieth century. The key features of his work, and his understanding of the phenomenological method, are considered in what follows.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. How to Interpret Husserl's Texts
  3. On the Concept of Number (Übert den Begriff der Zahl, 1887)
  4. Logical Investigations (Logische Untersuchungen, 1900-01)
  5. Ideas I (Ideen I, 1913)
  6. Ideas II (Ideen II)
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Biography

Edmund Husserl was born April 8, 1859, into a Jewish family in the town of Prossnitz in Moravia, then a part of the Austrian Empire. Although there was a Jewish technical school in the town, Edmund's father, a clothing merchant, had the means and the inclination to send the boy away to Vienna at the age of 10 to begin his German classical education in the Realgymnasium of the capital. A year later, in 1870, Edmund transferred to the Staatsgymnasium in Olmütz, closer to home. He was remembered there as a mediocre student who nevertheless loved mathematics and science, "of blond and pale complexion, but of good appetite." He graduated in 1876 and went to Leipzig for university studies.

At Leipzig Husserl studied mathematics, physics, and philosophy, and he was particularly intrigued with astronomy and optics. After two years he went to Berlin in 1878 for further studies in mathematics. He completed that work in Vienna, 1881-83, and received the doctorate with a dissertation on the theory of the calculus of variations. He was 24. Husserl briefly held an academic post in Berlin, then returned again to Vienna in 1884 and was able to attend Franz Brentano's lectures in philosophy.

In 1886 he went to Halle, where he studied psychology and wrote his Habilitationsschrift on the concept of number. He also was baptized. The next year he became Privatdozent at Halle and married a woman from the Prossnitz Jewish community, Malvine Charlotte Steinschneider, who was baptized before the wedding. The couple had three children. They remained at Halle until 1901, and Husserl wrote his important early books there. The Habilitationsschrift was reworked into the first part of Philosophie der Arithmetik, published in 1891. The two volumes of Logische Untersuchungen came out in 1900 and 1901.

In 1901 Husserl joined the faculty at Göttingen, where he taught for 16 years and where he worked out the definitive formulations of his phenomenology that are presented in Ideen zu einer reinen Ph‰nomenologie und phänomenologischen Philosophie (Ideas Pertaining to a Pure Phenomenology and to a Phenomenological Philosophy). The first volume of Ideen appeared in the first volume of Husserl's Jahrbuch für Philosophie und phänomenologische Forschung in 1913. Then the world war disrupted the circle of Husserl's younger colleagues, and Wolfgang Husserl, his son, died at Verdun. Husserl observed a year of mourning and kept silence professionally during that time.

However Husserl accepted appointment in 1916 to a professorship at Freiburg im Breisgau, a position from which he would retire in 1928. At Freiburg Husserl continued to work on manuscripts that would be published after his death as volumes two and three of the Ideen, as well as on many other projects. His retirement from teaching in 1928 did not slow the pace of his phenomenological research. But his last years were saddened by the escalation of National Socialism's racist policies against Jews. He died of pleurisy in 1938, on Good Friday, reportedly as a Christian.

Most commentators, therefore, recognize three periods in Husserl's career: the work at Halle, Göttingen, and Freiburg, respectively. Some argue that one or another of these periods ought to be taken as definitive and used as the interpretive key to unlock the others. But such an approach highlights disjunctions in Husserl's thought while neglecting the significant continuities. Important strands of Husserl's philosophy have their beginning long before his academic career commenced.

The community into which Husserl was born, Prossnitz, was a center of talmudic learning whose yeshiva had produced or welcomed a number of famous rabbis during the two centuries before Husserl's birth. This scholarly activity was supported by the industries of textile and clothing manufacture, through which Prossnitz's Jews had enhanced the prosperity of the region. Jews and Germans were minorities in the town and appear to have comprised its middle class. Their interests were naturally allied against those of the Slavic majority. (For example, the census of 1900 counted 1,680 Jews among the town's 24,000 inhabitants, according to The Jewish Encyclopedia.) In the ethnically diverse town, several dialects were spoken, and the language of the Husserl home probably was Yiddish.

The Jewish community of Prossnitz had established a technical school in 1843, and it became a public school for all the town's children in 1869--one year before young Edmund Husserl was sent off to Vienna's Realgymnasium. 1868 was also a year when civic authorities called for reform of Jewish education at all levels throughout Moravia. These developments reflect a movement toward modernization and integration after centuries of enforced segregation and legal restriction of Jewish life.

Prossnitz was the second-largest Jewish community in Moravia, with 328 families. Exactly 328 families; it could have no more, because of the quota established by the Bohemian Familianten Gesetz in 1787. The Jewish population was controlled through marriage licenses. Civil law set specific economic, age, and educational requirements; but in addition, the license could be granted only after a death freed up one of the allotted 328 slots. In effect, only first sons could hope to marry. Others had to emigrate if they wanted to have families of their own. This population-control policy was enforced until 1849, ten years before Edmund Husserl's birth. The requirement that Jews obtain special marriage licenses remained in effect until late in 1859, some months after Edmund's birth.

But Edmund Husserl's childhood was spent during an era of liberalization for Prossnitz's Jews. He received an elite secular education and probably made his father quite proud. At that period, gymnasia provided separate religious instruction for Christian boys and Jewish boys. Edmund's Jewish education would have continued in that context and in the language of secular culture, High German. He could hear and read the Bible in that modern language as well, for in the nineteenth century a wave of new translations into the language of German culture was spawned by Moses Mendelssohn's groundbreaking work. (Mendelssohn's 1783 translation into High German was printed in Hebrew characters, phonetically, to make it easy to read.) Some of these editions were lavishly illustrated for display in bourgeois homes like Edmund's, and most took into account the findings of recent historical and philological science. But during Edmund's childhood, translating the Hebrew Bible was still a controversial issue. Some educational leaders in the Jewish community warned that it would undermine Hebrew learning among the young. Hebrew learning was evidently not prized by a father who would send his son to the capital to study Greek and Latin at the age when boys traditionally were sent down the street to learn Hebrew and Torah. To complicate the picture, in 1870 when Edmund was eleven, a new rabbi came to serve the Prossnitz community.

One may surmise, then, that Edmund Husserl came by his knowledge of the Bible through his classical secular education, not his religious tradition. It was of a piece with the German cultural heritage for him. It was a source of literary allusions, and in later life he could compare himself to Moses and to Sisyphus with equal ease.

Literary allusions, along with fragments of correspondence, are all that remain to us for the reconstruction of what Husserl may have felt about himself and his work. There is no autobiography per se. But there are retrospective texts. One of the most illuminating is the brief introduction that Husserl prepared for the 1931 publication in English of the first book of Ideen, originally brought out in 1913.

Now in his seventies, Husserl complains that most readers have misunderstood his life's work. When he undertakes to reformulate what phenomenology is and what he has accomplished, however, he writes from a vantage point that he did not have some two decades earlier. Husserl becomes, in effect, a critic and interpreter of his own work, which he describes with a sustained metaphor. He portrays himself as an explorer who has opened the way into new territory so that others may conquer, map, and farm it. Of himself, Husserl writes:

"(H)e who for decades did not speculate about a new Atlantis but instead actually journeyed in the trackless wilderness of a new continent and undertook the virgin cultivation of some of its areas will not allow himself to be deterred in any way by the rejection of geographers who judge his reports according to their habitual ways of experiencing and thinking and thereby excuse themselves from the pain of undertaking travels in the new land" (422)

Here is another example of this characterization:

I can see spread out before me the endlessly open plains of true philosophy, the 'promised land', though its thorough cultivation will come after me" (429)

By means of this spatial, geographical metaphor of crossing over into the "new land," Husserl conveys something of the adventure and pioneer courage that should accompany phenomenological work. This science is related to "a new field of experience, exclusively its own, the field of 'transcendental subjectivity'," and it offers "a method of access to the transcendental-phenomenological sphere" (408). Husserl is the "first explorer" (419) of this marvelous place.

2. How to Interpret Husserl's Texts

Husserl had already employed the spatial metaphor in the 1913 text, although without explicit reference to himself as explorer. In chapter I-1 of Ideen I he had distinguished states of affairs (Sachverhaltnis) from essences (Wesen) by assigning them to two "spheres": the factual or material, and the formal or eidetic, respectively. These spheres are connected only by the mind's ability to pass between them as easily as moving around within either of them; they do not connect on their own, as it were. That is, no causality obtains between them. "Movement between" and "movement within" are of course further elaborations upon the spatial metaphor, and serve to designate the ability of consciousness to flow along, concentrate itself, linger, combine, focus, or disperse as it will. Such acts of consciousness belong to these spheres. They are worldly. They are "psychological."

Husserl's task is to get from those spheres into another "field" that is quite unlike them. It will be the sphere of absolute consciousness, consciousness when it isn't going anywhere. As the title of chapter II-3 puts it, this will be "The Region of Pure Consciousness." You can't "go there" with consciousness; instead you have to let the worldly go away and then inhabit what's left. This is the import of the infamous fantasy that opens paragraph 33: "(W)as kann als Sein noch setzbar sein, wenn das Weltall, das All der Realit‰t eingeklammert bleibt?" (In Kersten's paraphrase: "What can remain, if the whole world, including ourselves with all our cogitare, is excluded?" [63])

Now, it's quite curious that Husserl should choose the spatial metaphor to introduce and induce his phenomenological reduction. This metaphor invites confusion for anyone familiar with Descartes-- who after all named spatial extension as the substantial attribute of material being. None of Husserl's "spheres" is literally extended, in the Cartesian sense; yet all are coextensive (coincident) with material being--inasmuch as there's literally nowhere else besides the material universe where they could be. Why then should Husserl choose such an incongruous and counterproductive metaphor? A different metaphor (such as "fabric" or "organism," for example) could have conveyed the notions of coherence, separation, and access that Husserl intended. What is distinctive about the spatial metaphor, however, is that it connotes exploration and conquest. If transcendental consciousness is a promised land, then you need a Moses to lead you toward it. You need Husserl. When Husserl remarks, in the 1931 Introduction, that he can look down across that land that he has discovered, but that others will enter, this is a literary allusion to the figure of Moses, who led his people to Canaan, "the promised land," but did not lead them into it (Deuteronomy 34).

If these allusions from 1931 can be taken as a thumbnail self- portrait, still one must remember that it was sketched during Husserl's retirement. But Husserl's thought grew and changed throughout his long career. In his maturity, the philosopher joined his readers in producing commentary upon his youthful work. The three phases of Husserl's career--Halle, Göttingen, and Freiburg--invite facile divisions, and decisive turning points have been suggested within each of those periods. (The survival of nearly 45,000 pages of stenographic notes from Husserl's teaching and his private researches has fueled disputes about when he might have had the first glimmer of a thought that led to a lecture comment that led to a paragraph that found its way into a book published long after the man's papers and ashes were shelved in Louvain!)

Husserl himself insisted that the threads of continuity throughout the evolution of his thought were more significant than any false starts that later had to be repudiated. It seems well to grant him this point. Yet on two issues one must take seriously the critical discussion arising from disjunctions in Husserl's thought: (a) the question whether to characterize Husserl as realist or idealist, and (b) the question of which stage of Husserl's evolution--if any--should be taken as the definitive version through which all other versions are to be read. Husserl himself, writing as his own critic later in life, took a position on each of those issues. On (a), he insisted that he was and always had meant to be a transcendental idealist. On (b), he claimed competence to correct the insights of 1887, 1900, and 1913 with the insights of the 1920's and 1930's. Thus the mature Husserl would wish to erase the impression that his early work resolved the realism-idealism conundrum in favor of realism, and that it did so in fidelity to an insight already expressed in his earliest work on number.

Various punctuations of Husserl's career by time, place, and predominant question have been suggested by commentators (for example, Kockelmans 1967: 17-23; Ricoeur 1967: 3-12; Biemel 1970; and Bell 1990). Husserl's phenomenology developed gradually, but there were several relatively sudden turns and several stalls. Two examples suffice to illustrate. While at Halle shortly after the publication of Philosophie der Arithmetik, Husserl distanced himself from his recent efforts to establish mathematical and logical principles upon the psychological operations of the mind—a project that he later termed "psychologism." Many commentators have characterized this as an abrupt turn made in response to Frege's effective criticism of Philosophie der Arithmetik. However Mohanty (1982: 13), who examines the Frege-Husserl correspondence along with other documentary evidence, concludes to the contrary, that:

the seeds of development of Husserl's philosophy from the Philosophie der Arithmetik to the Prolegomena [i.e., the first volume of the Logische Untersuchungen, 1900] were immanent to his own thinking, so that the hypothesis of a traumatic effect of Frege's 1894 review of his book and a consequent reversal of his mode of thinking is not only uncalled for but also unsubstantiated by the available evidence.

Mohanty, then, provides ample warrant for a reading of Husserl that pursues threads of continuity between his early mathematical work and the breakthrough to phenomenology while at Halle.

In a second example of a supposed disjuncture in Husserl's development, there has been discussion of whether he changed his stance from realism to idealism between Göttingen and Freiburg. On the one hand, Eugen Fink (1933) and many others see a consistent evolution of transcendental idealism from the work published in Ideen I onward. They tend either to dismiss the earlier works as if they were merely youthful failures, or forcibly to harmonize the realist passages with Husserl's later positions. Husserl himself endorsed such a reading. On the other hand, those who studied with Husserl at Göttingen insist that his work at that time had validity and integrity in its own right. His former student Edith Stein (1932: 44-45) remarks that Husserl's disciples were surprised at the idealistic passages in Ideen, and she calls Fink a latecomer to Husserl's phenomenology. One of Stein's contemporaries among Husserl students, Roman Ingarden (1962: 159), says that:

the idealistic tendencies apparent in volume I of the Ideen had been opposed by his disciples when the work was being studied during the seminars at Göttingen and . . . his disciples pointed out many passages in the Ideen which seemed to contain direct arguments against his idealism.

Subsequently Ingarden presented arguments, based on both the text of Logische Untersuchungen and his conversations with Husserl, in support of the view that Husserl originally espoused a realist standpoint but later abandoned it (Ingarden 1975: 4-8). Further discussion of the issue is to be found in Kockelmans (1967: 418-449) and in Van de Pitte (1981: 36-42)--who suggests that the discrepancy will vanish if one reads Husserl's idealism as an epistemological or methodological approach to a metaphysically real world.

For his own part, Husserl (1931: 418-9) claimed that his transcendental idealism had advanced altogether beyond ordinary idealism, beyond realism, and beyond the very distinction between them. He denied that he ever had held a realist position:

. . . I still consider, as I did before, every form of the usual philosophical realism nonsensical in principle, no less so than that idealism which it sets itself up against in its arguments and which it "refutes." [Phenomenological reduction] is a piece of pure self- reflection, exhibiting the most original evident facts; moreover, if it brings into view in them the outlines of idealism . .. it is still anything but a party to the usual debates bewteen idealism and realism. . . .

Husserl argued that transcendental-phenomenological idealism did not deny the actual existence of the real world, but sought instead to clarify the sense of this world (which everyone accepts) as actually existing.

Thus Husserl joins the company of those who read his work "backwards," from the standpoint of Freiburg, interpreting the earliest work in light of the transcendental idealism of the latest. This reading grants no validity to the earlier work in its own right. It sets Husserl against Kant, and phenomenology's thoroughgoing idealism against Kantian critical idealism. Fink, in his detailed response to neo- Kantians' readings of Husserl's phenomenology (1932), scolds them for even addressing arguments made in Husserl's 1900-1 and 1913 publications--for Fink contends that those positions now must be assimilated to Husserl's later formulations. The extreme hermeneutical implications of this stance come clear in Fink's delineation of the threefold paradox entailed in reading Husserl's phenomenology: (1) It is inevitably misunderstood if the reader has not first cultivated the transcendental attitude; yet that attitude arises from the reading. (2) The words necessarily miss their meaning, and fail to refer effectively to the pre-worldly realm of transcendental subjectivity, since all available words are worldly. (3) Phenomenology goes to a realm beyond logic, individuation, and determination, which ordinarily structure understanding. In this extreme form, then, the Freiburg reading of Husserl's work is a locked door for the newcomer who is trying to get acquainted with Husserl's phenomenology.

Fortunately, there are other hermeneutical options. A second group of commentators read Husserl "forward" from his intellectual beginnings at Vienna and Halle. The early work in mathematics and logic continues to attract the interest of Analytic philosophers. They are among those who argue that Husserl's concern with numbers and logical reasoning, stimulated by the Kantian challenge, fructified in the prescription of eidetic and, eventually, phenomenological reductions.

Besides reading Husserl from Halle "forward" or from Freiburg "backward," there is yet a third option. One may base one's reading upon the Göttingen period and upon questions involving the genesis of the Ideen, as the keystone in the arch of Husserl's development. This is the stance suggested by Ingarden, who considered Husserl's later transcendentalism a big mistake, and by Stein, whose own subsequent works unfold the implications of the realism and personalism embraced by Husserl at that period. On this view the world, lost by Kant, is won back for science.

The problems of oneness and unity occupied Husserl throughout all the phases of his philosophical development: his earliest work on number and logic, his pre-war realist descriptive phenomenology, and his idealist transcendental phenomenology. His philosophy in some respects parallels the emergence of modern psychology, with whose tenets it should not be confused. The following are his major works.

3. On the Concept of Number (Übert den Begriff der Zahl, 1887)

Husserl's Habilitationsschrift is subtitled "psychological analyses," and it addresses the question how we recognize manyness within a group. Husserl remarks that the common definition of number--that number is a multiplicity of units--leaves two key questions unanswered: "What is 'multiplicity'? And what is 'unity'?" It is the former question, multiplicity, that occupies his attention throughout the essay. However the latter question, unity, haunts the discussion and refuses to be ignored.

Husserl locates the origin of multiplicity in the activity of combining, which he takes to be a psychological process. After much consideration he identifies this activity as synthesis, or the gathering of items into a set. He notices then that synthetic unities are of two kinds. Either the relationship through which the multiple items belong to the one set is a content of the mental representation of those items (right in there alongside them as another item that can be attended to and counted), or it is not there. In the former case, the unity is physical. Otherwise it is psychical, stemming from the unifying mental act that sets the contents into the relationship.

Having made that distinction between natural or physical unity, and arbitrary or imposed unity, Husserl then goes on to contrast these varieties of synthetic oneness with something else entirely: unsynthesized unity. His example is a rose, whose so-called parts are continuous and come apart only for the examining mind.

"In order to note the uniting relations in such a whole, analysis is necessary. If, for example, we are dealing with the representational whole which we call 'a rose,' we get at its various parts successively, by means of analysis: the leaves, the stem.... Each part is thrown into relief by a distinct act of noticing, and is steadily held together with those parts already segregated" (114).

Ironically, Husserl has struck gold while mining coal, and doesn't quite recognize what he's got hold of. His description of nonsynthesized unity comes almost as a byproduct of his attempt to differentiate physical or real collective combination from psychic combination. He writes:

"... these combining relations present themselves as, so to speak, a certain 'more,' in contrast to the mere totality, which appears merely to seize upon its parts, but not really to unite them [because they're already united, independently of the mind!].... In the totality there is a lack of any intuitive unification, as that sort of unification so clearly manifests itself in the metaphysical or continuous whole" (114).

Husserl has succeeded in distinguishing between natural and artificially synthesized wholes, on the one hand, and, on the other hand, those totalities that are known as having been accomplished neither by natural aggregation nor by mental combination. The unity of such wholes is known to be real, even though it admits of subsequent mental analysis or physical dissection.

Again ironically, in his concluding discussion of "number" Husserl neglects to notice the number one even as he employs it to illustrate how combination works. Substituting the term "and" for the term "collective combination," Husserl remarks:

"(T)otality or multiplicity in abstracto is nothing other than 'something or other', and 'something or other', and 'something or other', etc.; or, more briefly, one thing, and one thing, and one thing, etc. Thus we see that the concept of the multiplicity contains, besides the concept of collective combination, only the concept something. Now this most general of all concepts is, as to its origin and content, easily analyzed" (116).

Husserl terms the concept something the most general concept. It stands for any object--real or unreal, physical or psychical--upon which we reflect. Thus he says that multiplicity as a concept arises out of the indetermination of the et-cetera that allows the series of "one and one and one and ..." to go however far you like.

Yet an objection must be registered concerning what Husserl has found but not noticed. Multiplicity is but relatively undetermined; ultimately, multiplicity is in fact determined, or reined in, by one itself. This happens at three points. (a) One is the starting point of the counting series. Every number except the first number is a multiplicity; therefore the set of natural numbers is greater (by one!) than the set of multiplicities. (b) One determines the unit of counting. Only one something at a time gets counted. The and's must be put in between one's. (c) Although the series can stop anywhere, nevertheless it has to stop at one single place, not at several places. Every number is one distinct number.

Husserl, however, tries to produce the concept number by suppressing what he has taken to be the absolute indetermination of the something-series. This is how he gets determinate multiplicity, which he equates with number. In other words, the and's are the main ingredient for making numbers Husserl-style. This is incorrect, of course, but it is incorrect in an interesting way. For example, to make the number five, you would need four and's. To come up with those four and's, you would have to count them out; but before you could count to four, you would need three and's with which to make that four. But... there's a regression back to one. The number five is four and's, and five one's.

The maddening difficulty of focusing upon combination eventually will have a happy outcome, which Husserl did not see in 1887. The truly interesting problem is one, the prime ingredient in numbers and the determiner whose own determination was to become Husserl's guiding quest.

4. Logical Investigations (Logische Untersuchungen, 1900-01)

With the turn of the century, Husserl's attention turned from and to one; that is, away from the mental activity of combining, and toward that which is reliably there to be combined. He wanted to show that mental activity is not the source of the latter. Chapter 8 of LU I exposes and refutes the three premises or "prejudices" of psychologism. In short, "psychologism" for Husserl is the error of collapsing the normative or regulative discipline of logic down onto the merely descriptive discipline of psychology. It would make mental operations (such as combination) the source of their own regulation. The "should" of logic, that utter necessity inhering in logical inference, would become no more than the "is" or facticity of our customary thinking processes, empirically described.

Husserl's formulation and refutation of the three psychologistic premises is wickedly clever, but cannot be treated in detail here. (See # 43-49 of LU I.) One example must suffice. Psychologism, Husserl charges, would place logical inferences on the same plane with mental operations (# 44), and this would make even mathematics into a branch of psychology (# 45). Indeed, math and logic do have structures that are isomorphic to those of mental operations, such as combination and distinction. But given that similarity, how then would one distinguish the regulation of any of these processes from the description of it? Under psychologism, there's no way. But Husserl makes the distinction in a way that also shows how regulation (that is, the laws of logic) comes from elsewhere than the plane of mental activity.

And he does this by virtue of one. In # 46 Husserl agrees with his opponents that arithmetical operations occur in patterns that refer back to mental acts for their origin and also for their meaning. However, there's a difference between them as well. Mental acts transpire in time: they begin and end, and they can be repeated and individually counted. Numbers, in contrast, are timeless. While they can be represented in mental acts, this representation is not a fresh production of the number but rather an instantiation of its form. There is only one five. Any time we count five things, it isn't a production of a new five but merely a deja vu for the same old five, eternal five. We can't count numbers themselves, for there's only one of each. (A similar argument is made in #22 of Ideas I.)

The same goes for logic, Husserl says. Concepts comprising the laws of pure logic can have no empirical range. Their range or sphere is ideal singulars, not mental generalizations from multiple instantiations. The operators of logic are other than those mental acts that happen to share the same names: "and," "not," "is," "or," "implies," "may," "must," "should." Psychologically, there can be many factual acts of combining, negating, etc. Logically, there is only one "and," one "not," etc. Husserl concedes here, as he did for arithmetic, that the logical operators take their origin and meaning from the mental acts. This accounts for the equivocal character of logical terms, which refer both to ideal singulars, and to mental states and acts. But if you fail to notice this equivocation, you become ensnared in psychologism, losing the possibility of pure logic and unified science.

The danger of equivocation extends over judgments as well. On the one hand, we can count multiple apperceptive events of affirmation, occurring psychologically, which proceed in time, begin and end, and recur as often as we like, in happenings that can be distinguished one from another. On the other hand, the judgment thus reached remains the same throughout each act accessing it. It seems to persist and to be called back for encore appearances; it seems even to have pre-existed its first appearance to me (# 47). In this latter sense, the judgment is not the same as the mental act that reaches it. Moreover, the truth of the judgment is neither equivalent to nor dependent upon the psychological experience of clear evidence that accompanies the mental act embracing it. Husserl easily shows this by recalling that in both logic and arithmetic, there are truths that have never been entertained in any human consciousness, and indeed could never be humanly conceived (# 50). (Cases of truth without the possibility of psychological evidence would include the computation of very large numbers, and decisions about membership in sets that are uncountably large. The arithmetical and logical operations connected with such determinations could never be "done" by a human mind or a computer. Their truth cannot be "factual.")

The number one, then, has become Husserl's touchstone for discriminating between psychological processes and logical laws. It is his reality detector. What is psychological (or empirical) comes on in discrete individual instances--ones--and you can examine their edges. What is logical (or ideal) comes on as a seamless oceanic unity without temporal edges, reliably persisting even when not attended to. Husserl's sensitivity to the modes of unity, first expressed in the Habilitationsschrift and developed in LU, provides the launching pad for transcendental phenomenology.

5. Ideas I (Ideen I, 1913)

What launches transcendental phenomenology is the recognition that those modes of unity correlate with each other and with a third mode of unity, in ways that are tantalizingly asymmetrical. These three onenesses are: the factual unity of things and states of affairs, the eidetic unity of essences, and the living unity of consciousness as it flows along in a stream of experiences. Each has, and exhibits, its own distinctive kind of identity and persistence. Factual and essential unities give objects to the straightforward regard of consciousness, entering it as items of experience, each in its distinctive way; but consciousness can also deflect its regard back onto these enterings and discover its own unity, which is unlike either of theirs.

The possibility of this complex correlation is provided by the "principle of principles": that intuitions come on to us with distinctive boundary-conditions that we can accept as sources insuring the correctness of our knowledge of them. Or in Husserl's formulation:

"... that every originary presentive intuition is a legitimizing source of cognition, that everything originarily (so to speak, in its "personal" actuality) offered to us in 'intuition' is to be accepted simply as what it is presented as being, but also only within the limits in which it is presented there" (44).

The different kinds of unities have different kinds of edges, and these give away what kind of a unity each of them is going to be. But it's easy to miss the differences. That happens in the natural attitude, Husserl says, when all the objects of consciousness are taken as if they were factual items. Husserl complains that even his Logische Untersuchungen have been misunderstood as advocating just this error of "Platonic realism," by those who read into his use of the term "object" the implication that, through a perverse hypostatization, every thought turns into a thing (# 22). On the contrary, he says, the eidetic reduction, operative already in LU, empowers him to differentiate between how essences appear, and how cases appear.

Now with Ideen I, this distinction is sketched in beautiful detail. You can tell when the object occupying your consciousness is a physical thing, because things don't give themselves to you all at once. What you get instead is a perspective inviting you to move around to the other side to perceive some more of the thing. All the while the thing keeps its unity to itself, as the reference point of all the angles it gives to you, and out of which you must reproduce or copy or simulate the unified thing as you conceive it. But in conceiving, you don't have to put an "and" between two separate perceptions, the north face of a building and the south face, in order to yield the perception of the building as if it were a sum. These different views are given to you as continuous, as views of one thing.

Husserl terms this "shading off" or adumbration. (The notion of off-shading is reminiscent of a multiple-exposure photograph that captures successive phases of a movement in a single frame. Such photos were being seen for the first time at the turn of the century. Husserl also mentions new media such as the stereoscope and the cinema.) In contrast, essences give themselves to you all at once. Their boundaries are not sides, but rather laws entailing the characteristic necessities and possibilities of kinds of things (more about which below). The unity of any particular essence coheres within that determinate outermost boundary which free imaginative variations of possible cases must not exceed if they are to remain cases of this particular kind. Essential unity is centripetal, so to speak.

Then are those other unities--the ones presenting themselves as extended or factual--to be termed centrifugal, inasmuch as each spins off appearances in all directions from an inaccessible center? No, for their off-shading appears contextualized, as a foreground; and even as we focus upon the foreground it pulls its background into readiness for perception as soon as attention may shift to it. Every one is surrounded by a halo of and's, and beyond that are other somethings, seemingly without end. Whatever is extended is inexorably connected to whatever else is extended. (This last formulation, by the way, is an instance of an eidetic law. But the shift of attention that brings this essential rule into view is an eidetic reduction, and it wrenches us away from our naive attention to instances of things naturally appearing, under consideration here.) Every perception "motivates" another, stretching on toward expanding horizons.

The shift to the transcendental attitude--that is, the phenomenological or transcendental reduction--brings to Husserl's notice a third kind of unity, which discloses the off-shading of things in a startling new way. We notice now that what is adumbrated is spatial, but the adumbration itself is not spatial. It arises in consciousness. "Abschattung ist Erlebnis" (95), while what is adumbrated, das Abgeschattete, has to be something spatial. The off-shading of things is at the same time the streaming of conscious life. Peculiarly, the giving off of partial perceptibilities (by the thing) coincides with the taking up of partial perceptions (by streaming consciousness). Which one is doing the shading? Agency cannot be imputed absolutely to either side.

But on the "side" of consciousness, as it were, we now recognize that we are dealing with more than a progression of life-bites strung together in series with and's. The stream of conscious life is not a sum or aggregate; nor is it a generalization. That is, it exhibits a unity unlike either the sachverhaltig unity of a factual case or the eidetisch unity of an essence. Husserl must account for that unity, which he calls an ego, Ich.

Moreover, and of paramount significance, with the benefit of the transcendental reduction it can now be told that these three kinds of unities themselves are not connected merely in series, with and's combining them, as if they were three discrete somethings. Their relationship is vastly more subtle. In order to understand it, through reduction we try to isolate unity from what accounts for unity. (We are not looking for something "prior to" unity -- such as some "cause" of unity --, because we can't have priority without having the number one, and oneness is just what is in question.)

Isolating oneness from the live experience-stream means removing the individual subject (you or me or Napoleon or whomever) from consideration. What is left, says Husserl, is transcendental subjectivity, "the pure act-process with its own essence" ("das reine Akterlebnis mit seinem eigenen Wesen"). (Paradoxically, we can see, right here in this formulation, that the reduction has not at all done away with essence, with states of affairs, or even with identity. We still have Eigenheit and Wesen, set in relation within a sentence. But these are now supposedly purified.) Husserl likens this de-individualized ego to a ray (# 92) or glance (# 101). Characteristically (or essentially) it has two poles or directions: the noematic and the noetic (from Greek terms noema and noesis, indicating what is thought and the act of thinking, respectively).

Husserl's discussion of "noetic-noematic structures" fails in its attempt to show how the ego reaches and secures both the unity of the known object, and the unity of the knowing subject. But it fails in a spectacular starburst of insight. Husserl notices that the mental stream has its own distinctive kind of adumbrations or continuities, which are more complex than those discussed above, the relatively simple off-shaded appearings of spatial objects in perception. Beyond that simple sort of off-shading, consciousness can also turn back on itself and reflect upon its own intending acts, or on any component thereof. The stream meanders among spatial objects, but can also at whim objectify aspects of its own acts of intending, and consider them. This yields a thick layering of possible objects (# 97). For example, here are some noemata that might enter the live experience stream: pencils ... writing ... German verbs ... the frustration of strong verbs ... Ulrike ... memories in general ... the unreliability of memory ... components of perceptions ... the advisability of analyzing perceptions into their components ... the smell of popcorn wafting into the study ... the effort to resist distractions ... and so forth.

Some of these arise directly from things, while others arise as objectifications of what was inherent a moment ago in the very act of knowing, the noesis. How can we tell the difference? Husserl answers that you can tell when the ego-beam has penetrated through to the bottom of the stack of noemata, so to speak, and has gotten ahold of a thing itself, because at that point, all the aspects of the thing are known immanently--really--in the act of perceiving as being contained in the sense of the thing (# 98). For example, you know popcorn itself when you are perceiving the taste of butter and salt. (You do not know popcorn when you read this sentence; instead, you are reflecting on what it is to know popcorn, and popcorn's qualities are not given immanently within your object. But then while tasting popcorn, saltiness was given immanently but not objectified.)

Husserl rightly points out that we are able to slide up and down the pole of the ego-beam at will, moving now toward the thing, now away from it to consider the act of knowing and its modalities. For example, noematically I can consider a certain cat who probably exists, but then I can turn back noetically to assess the degree of certitude that characterizes my consideration of that selfsame cat as existing (# 105). Now if we were to slide down to the point where all modalities are behind us on the noetic side of the pole, and if there we were to face the object, we would get the pure sense of the object in which its unity is given.

In # 102 Husserl claims that this can happen, and that we can indeed slide far enough toward the object that the unity of the noema will be known as not having been imposed by the act of knowing. At that point, all of its qualities supposedly will be given immanently, really, contained in the perception rather than in the secondary conscious act that may grasp it a split-second later. Its sense will have been captured as something known with certainty to comprise its qualities, without the interference of a synthetic conscious act. (If this worked, it would effectively ensure the objectivity of knowledge, and would win the day for realism against idealism.) Husserl writes:

"The noematic objects ... are unities transcendent to, but evidentially intended to in, the mental process. But if that is the case, then characteristics, which arise in [those unities] for consciousness and which are seized upon as their properties in focusing the regard on them, cannot possibly be regarded as really inherent moments of the mental process" (248-249).

Rather, they inhere in the object's sense, and subsequently are lifted out for analysis in the mental process.

The ambitiousness of this claim is matched by that of another, which has to do with the opposite end of the ego-pole. In # 108 Husserl says that we can also shinny far enough up the ego-pole that we can capture the affirming noesis in its purity. All the modalities will have been loaded over onto the side of the noema, and the no_sis will be a believing affirmation, pure and simple: an unqualified yes. Thus Husserl insists that there is a crucial difference between (a) being validly negated and (b) not-being. For example, he would distinguish (a) denying correctly that my spayed cat has a kitten, from (b) affirming that the kitten of my spayed cat is a non-entity. With (a), the negativity inheres in the noesis, which has not yet been purified of all modality; but with (b), the noesis would be pure affirmation (# 104).

How correct is Husserl's argument? We must grant that whatever makes this particular kitten impossible inheres elsewhere than in my knowing about it, for my denying something can't make it go away. Furthermore, there's nothing to prevent my forcing myself to think positively the thought of the kitten that my cat never had. Such a noetic posture is at least conceivable. However, its mere possibility is not enough to accomplish Husserl's purpose. Husserl needs to show that this pure affirming belief really is done, somewhere somehow, in the toughest case, the case of an intrinsically impossible entity such as the kitten of a spayed cat. (That is, has anyone succeeded in recapturing that magic moment of purely affirming noesis with regard to an intrinsically impossible object? And if so, how would one go about certifying the accomplishment?)

Unfortunately, neither end of the ego-ray connects as Husserl had hoped. At the noetic pole, the purely affirming ego eludes the grasp of consciousness; so does the pure sense of the thing itself, at the noematic pole. These terms may remain as ideal asymptotes toward which the ego-ray continually points while continually falling short. The successful recovery of the connection between knowing and reality awaits another strategy, to be mounted by Husserl in the posthumously published second volume of Ideen.

6. Ideas II (Ideen II)

The second volume of Husserl's Ideen (publication withheld until 1952) is the work of many hands. Husserl was dissatisfied with it and did not publish it. The first draft was written very rapidly in 1912, immediately after the manuscript of the first volume was completed. Husserl added material in 1915, and turned it over for editing to his assistant Edith Stein, who had come with him to Freiburg from Gottingen. Stein transcribed the work from Husserl's shorthand in 1916. He gave her further material, and in 1918 she produced a collation arranged and titled as at present: the constitution of material nature, of animal nature, and of the cultural world. But Husserl's phenomenology was evolving, and the manuscript did not suit him. Another assistant, Ludwig Landgrebe, worked on it 1923-25, and Husserl himself edited it in again 1928. It finally came out posthumously.

If the pursuit of unity had guided Husserl like a north star from his earliest writing on through the discovery and first articulation of phenomenology, then in Ideen II that star becomes obscured by "light pollution" from numerous more recent and competing insights. Without access to the manuscripts, it is impossible to know with precision how that came about. In portions of the text as we have it, the concern with unity remains a significant factor.

However, other portions seem to go against the grain of key insights from the first volume and the earlier works. For example, in LU and Ideen I, the material sphere had comprised states of affairs; that is, facts or cases such as could be expressed in logical propositions. There were indeed "things" in there, such as roses, yet the emphasis was upon the factual scenarios into which these things figured. By contrast, in Ideen II "material nature" is populated with substantial items, and the fact they are embedded in circumstances has to be additionally stipulated, almost as an afterthought (# 15c). By the same token, in the earlier work the eidetic sphere had comprised the forms of logical propositions and the rules of inference. While there were indeed "essences" entailed there, nevertheless the emphasis fell upon the lawful patterns of thinking about being. By contrast, in Ideen II "animal nature" is populated by psychic items whose unity is analogous to that of physical things yet whose active engagement with the latter can hardly be explained.

This shift matters, because judgments and perceptions reach unity in quite different ways. To certify that one selfsame proposition (e.g., that the cat is on the mat) returns to our consciousness on several occasions is quite a different task than to certify that one selfsame substantial entity (e.g., this mat-loving cat) returns to our sight every afternoon. Husserl's early discoveries about unity had to do with judgment, and they were based upon the lived difference between synthetic judgments and analytic judgments. His ambitions then were not primarily metaphysical or epistemological. Moreover, it is relatively easy to "feel" the difference among three sorts of judgment: (a) a synthetic judgment that arbitrarily groups several items together, (b) a synthetic judgment that groups things in recognition of some characteristic that all share independently of the judgment, and (c) a judgment that the unity imputed to a thing is not owing to judgment at all. The distinction among these judgment-forms was already established in the Habilitationsschrift. However the task undertaken in Ideen II is forcibly to transpose that distinction onto perception, and so to come up with a general test for certifying when knowledge is genuinely in touch with reality.

This project is set in motion in # 9, where new terminology is introduced for the threefold distinction first made in "Begriff der Zahl." (However, now that the transcendental reduction is presupposed, the arrow of causality should be removed. There can be only correlation or its absence.) BZ's "psychic relation" now becomes "categorial synthesis," in which perception serendipitously collects disparate items into one group, for no special reason intrinsic to the items. BZ's "content relation" (or "physical relation") becomes "aesthetic synthesis" (or "sensuous synthesis"), in which perception recognizes some intrinsic reason for grouping these items and finds itself constrained to do so by something other than mere whim. And BZ's uncomposed unity (e.g., "that rose there") becomes the "pure sense-object."

In BZ, "synthesis" meant a combining judgment: a judgment that erected a set of things with many members. A set with one member--that is, a unified thing--obviously needed no synthesizing judgment to set it up. In Ideen II, however, "synthesis" means a perception that, while receiving multiple impressions (the off-shadings or Abschattungen), composes an object out of them. But this object is a unity, not a group; in fact, it is what Husserl would earlier have called an uncomposed unity. In other words aesthetic synthesis--operating now over partial views, not discrete items--finds that it has a reason for referring those multiple impressions to one object, even though the unity of the thing never gives itself directly to consciousness. What is that reason? This question is enticing, because Husserl is tantalizingly close here to describing a way in which the real unity of things is available for knowledge.

Husserl works on this question in # 15b, where "the spatial body is a synthetic unity of a manifold of strata of 'sensuous appearances' of different senses" (42-43). The spatially extended thing is a unity drawing together all the experiences we have had of it, and summoning us toward further experiences of it through sight and touch and our other senses. It achieves its unity as a spatial location, which seems not to depend upon whether or not it is actually perceived.

However, Husserl cautions, this unity alone is insufficient to validate itself. He writes:

"(W)e have first taken the body as independent of all causal conditioning, i.e., merely as a unity which presents itself visually or tactually, through multiplicities of sensations, as endowed with an inner content of characteristic features.... But in what we have said, it is also implied that under the presupposition referred to (namely, that we take the thing outside of the nexuses in which it is a thing) we do not find, as we carry out experiences, any possibility for deciding, in a way that exhibits, whether the experienced material thing is actual or whether we are subject to mere illusion and are experiencing a mere phantom" (43).

Thus, reality is not guaranteed for an isolated item, even when it seems to be giving us a reason to take it as the unified core attracting its manifold appearings to one hub of reference. The central location of the thing is dependent upon its real circumstances, as Husserl goes on to say in # 15c. The reality of "one" depends on "others"; i.e., on thing-connection. The thing is what it is in relation to its surroundings. This becomes apparent when things move and change, for their changes must correlate coherently with reciprocal changes in the things next to them.

Such co-variance is what certifies reality--or materiality, which Husserl seems to equate with it. In # 15c, reality means substantial causality. Within the webwork of material things, everything affects everything else. The real is the causal. Co-variance across the material realm, then, is what certifies the oneness and reality of that realm (# 15e).

Animated bodies also connect in the webwork of material things (# 13). Each of them is a center of appearings, a one, just as every other thing is. However, unlike soulless bodies, each animal is also a zero. It lives at a point of origination. The animal body bears the zero-point of orientation for the pure ego (61), as its absolute "here" (135, 166). Arithmetically, this is a stunning contrast. Every "something" whatsoever is either a one or a one-and-one-and-etc. But the animated body, in addition to being just one of those somethings, is also the one who is zero: the one from whom the counting starts, the one who chooses whether and where it is appropriate to insert the and's.

But any series that is initiated by/at/in the living body is counted off nonarbitrarily. Such series go in order; they are "motivated." This is owing to the movement of the body itself within the material web. The body's own kinesthetic sense will coordinate with the corresponding changes in sensory perceptions as it navigates among things. Thus, the zero shifts position in relation to the other unified centers to which perceptions accrue; but as it does so, the series of their appearings change in a regular way (63).

What about counting zero's? Are they multiple; are there many human bodies? Husserl declines to pursue this avenue of approach into the problem of other minds and human community. Intersubjectivity will treated instead as an implication of the reality of the material world, not a precondition for it. The multiplicity of bodies is taken up only on page 83, where it is admitted that the foregoing analysis has been framed on the assumption that there would be only one, "solipsistic," point-zero in reality. Belatedly, other bodies now are brought into the picture--but not because they are necessary for its unity, or because they have been apprehended among the realities presenting to consciousness. The others are brought in because they are required for the full unification of the thing in reality, whether that thing is one of the physical bodies or my very own live body. To be is to be describable (87). Reality for the thing entails a possibility of appearing to anyone at all. Being counted from one zero-point is not enough for the real thing. To count, it needs the possibility of being counted from multiple directions.

The thing is a rule of appearances. That means that the thing is a reality as a unity of a manifold of appearances connected according to rules. Moreover, this unity is an intersubjective one.... The physicalistic thing is intersubjectively common in that it has validity for all individuals who stand in possible communion with us (91-92).

To be real, the thing must count as a place or location, a center, independently of any particular point of origin. Yet what grants reality to the thing is not some consensus reached by observers. Indeed, the thing may look entirely different to different observers; however, its reality constrains all to agree that, at least, "it is there." Oddly, then, the real thing is another kind of zero, for its barest reality consists in its being an empty place-holder (91-93).

Finally, Husserl makes unity a synonym for the philosophical term "substance" as traditionally meant. For example, he says that both the soul and the body are unities, so that an analogy obtains between psychic unity and material unity (129, 131). Oneness becomes the ontological form that determines substantial reality (133). The pure ego is one with respect to an individual stream of consciousness, that is, before the transcendental reduction has de-individuated the latter (117); however the pure ego is insubstantial and not one whenever the reduction is in effect (128).

And so Husserl's quest for unity splinters and spends itself out by diverting into many contradictory projects pursued by the many unharmonized voices of Ideen II. Although the manuscript remained unpublished, it was made available for consultation by a number of Husserl's younger colleagues. Among the last publication of Husserl's lifetime was the Cartesian Meditations of 1931, in which he addressed the apparent solipsism of his transcendental phenomenology. That work itself was undergoing a comprehensive reworking in partnership with Husserl's assistant Eugen Fink during the years before Husserl's death in 1938.

7. References and Further Reading

Husserl's publications and his extensive Nachlass are being brought out in a multi-volume critical edition entitled Husserliana - Edmund Husserl, Gesammelte Werke, from Nijhoff in The Hague. The major works published during Husserl's lifetime are the following:

  • Über den Begriff der Zahl. Psychologische Analysen, 1887.
  • Philosophie der Arithmetik. Psychologische und logische Untersuchungen, 1891.
  • Logische Untersuchungen. Erste Teil: Prolegomena zur reinen Logik, 1900; reprinted 1913.
  • Logische Untersuchungen. Zweite Teil: Untersuchungen zur Phänomenologie und Theorie der Erkenntnis, 1901; second edition 1913 (for part one); second edition 1921 (for part two).
  • "Philosophie als strenge Wissenschaft," Logos 1 (1911) 289-341.
  • Ideen zu einer reinen Ph‰nomenologie und phänomenologischen Philosophie. Erstes Buch: Allgemeine Einführung in die reine Phänomenologie, 1913.
  • "Vorlesungen zur Phänomenologie des inneren Zeitbewusstseins," Jahrbuch für Philosophie und phänomenologische Forschung 9 (1928), 367-498.
  • "Formale und transzendentale Logik. Versuch einer Kritik der logischen Vernunft," Jahrbuch für Philosophie und phänomenologische Forschung 10 (1929) 1-298.
  • Mèditations cartèsiennes, 1931.
  • "Die Krisis der europäischen Wissenschaften und die transzentale Phänomenologie: Eine Einleitung in die phänomenologische Philosophie," Philosophia 1 (1936) 77-176.

Works translated into English by Husserl (In chronological order.  Publication dates of the German originals are in brackets.)

  • "Philosophy as Rigorous Science," trans. in Q. Lauer (ed.), Phenomenology and the Crisis of Philosophy, New York: Harper [1910], 1965.
  • Formal and Transcendental Logic, trans. D. Cairns. The Hague: Nijhoff [1929], 1969.
  • The Crisis of European Sciences and Transcendental Philosophy, trans. D. Carr. Evanston: Northwestern University Press
    [1936/54], 1970.
  • Logical Investigations, trans. J. N. Findlay, London: Routledge [1900/01; 2nd, revised edition 1913], 1973.
  • Experience and Judgement, trans. J. S. Churchill and K. Ameriks, London: Routledge [1939], 1973.
  • Ideas Pertaining to a Pure Phenomenology and to a Phenomenological Philosophy - Third Book: Phenomenology and the Foundations of the Sciences, trans. T. E. Klein and W. E. Pohl, Dordrecht: Kluwer, 1980.
  • Ideas Pertaining to a Pure Phenomenology and to a Phenomenological Philosophy -- First Book: General Introduction to a Pure Phenomenology, trans. F. Kersten. The Hague: Nijhoff (= Ideas) [1913], 1982.
  • Cartesian Meditations, trans. D. Cairns, Dordrecht: Kluwer [1931], 1988.
  • Ideas Pertaining to a Pure Phenomenology and to a Phenomenological Philosophy - Second Book: Studies in the Phenomenology of Constitution, trans. R. Rojcewicz and A. Schuwer, Dordrecht: Kluwer, 1989.
  • On the Phenomenology of the Consciousness of Internal Time (1893-1917), trans. J. B. Brough, Dordrecht: Kluwer [1928], 1990.
  • Early Writings in the Philosophy of Logic and Mathematics, trans. D. Willard, Dordrecht: Kluwer, 1994.
  • The Essential Husserl, ed. D. Welton, Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1999.

Further Reading:

  • Bell, David (1990) Husserl, London: Routledge.
  • Bernet, Rudolf and Kern, Iso and Marbach, Eduard (1993) An Introduction to Husserlian Phenomenology, Evanston: Northwestern University Press.
  • Carr, David (1987) Interpreting Husserl, Dordrecht: Nijhoff.
  • Derrida, Jacques (1978) Edmund Husserl's 'Origin of Geometry', trans. J.P. Leavy, New York: Harvester Press, 1978.
  • Dreyfus, Hubert (ed.) (1982) Husserl, Intentionality, and Cognitive Science, Cambridge/Mass.: MIT Press.
  • Drummond, John (1990) Husserlian Intentionality and Non-Foundational Realism, Dordrecht: Kluwer.
  • Levinas, E., (1973) The Theory of Intuition in Husserl's Phenomenology, Evanston: Northwestern University Press.
  • Mohanty, J. N. and McKenna, William (eds.) (1989) Husserl's Phenomenology: A Textbook, Lanham: University Press of America.
  • Smith, Barry and Smith, David Woodruff (eds.) (1995) The Cambridge Companion to Husserl, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Sokolowski, Robert (ed.) (1988) Edmund Husserl and the Phenomenological Tradition, Washington: Catholic University of America Press.
  • Zahavi, Dan (2003) Husserl's Phenomenology, Stanford: Stanford University Press.


Author Information

Marianne Sawicki
Dickinson School of Law, Pennsylvania State University
U. S. A.

Thrasymachus (fl. 427 B.C.E.)

Thrasymachus of Chalcedon is one of several "older sophists" (including Antiphon, Critias, Hippias, Gorgias, and Protagoras) who became famous in Athens during the fifth century B.C.E. We know that Thrasymachus was born in Chalcedon, a colony of Megara in Bithynia, and that he had distinguished himself as a teacher of rhetoric and speechwriter in Athens by the year 427. Beyond this, relatively little is known about his life and works. Thrasymachus' lasting importance is due to his memorable place in the first book of Plato's Republic. Although it is not quite clear whether the views Plato attributes to Thrasymachus are indeed the views the historical person held, Thrasymachus' critique of justice has been of considerable importance, and seems to represent moral and political views that are representative of the Sophistic Enlightenment in late fifth century Athens.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Sources
  2. Doctrines
  3. Influence
  4. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Life and Sources

The precise years of Thrasymachus' birth and death are hard to determine. According to Dionysius, he is younger than Lysias, who Dionysius falsely believed to be born in 459 B.C.E. Aristotle places him between Tisias and Theodorus, but he does not list any precise dates. Cicero mentions Thrasymachus several times in connection with Gorgias and seems to imply that Gorgias and Thrasymachus were contemporaries. A precise reference date for Thrasymachus' life is provided by Aristophanes, who makes fun of him in his first play Banqueters. That play was performed in 427, and we can conclude therefore that he must have been teaching in Athens for several years before that. One of the surviving fragments of Thrasymachus' writing (Diels-Kranz Numbering System 85b2) contains a reference to Archelaos, who was King of Macedonia from 413-399 B.C.E. We thus can conclude that Thrasymachus was most active during the last three decades of the fifth century.

2. Doctrines

The remaining fragments of Thrasymachus' writings provide few clues about his philosophical ideas. They either deal with rhetorical issues or they are excerpts from speeches (DK 85b1 and b2) that were (probably) written for others and thus can hardly be seen as the expression of Thrasymachus' own thoughts. The most interesting fragment is DK 85b8. It contains the claim that the gods do not care about human affairs since they do not seem to enforce justice. Scholars have, however, been divided whether this claim is compatible with the position Plato attributes to Thrasymachus in the first book of the Republic. Plato's account there is by far the most detailed, though perhaps historically suspect, evidence for Thrasymachus' philosophical ideas.

In the first book of the Republic, Thrasymachus attacks Socrates' position that justice is an important good. He claims that 'injustice, if it is on a large enough scale, is stronger, freer, and more masterly than justice' (344c). In the course of arguing for this conclusion, Thrasymachus makes three central claims about justice.

  1. Justice is nothing but the advantage of the stronger (338c)
  2. Justice is obedience to laws (339b)
  3. Justice is nothing but the advantage of another (343c).

There is an obvious tension among these three claims. It is far from clear why somebody who follows legal regulations must always do what is in the interest of the (politically) stronger, or why these actions must serve the interests of others. Scholars have tried to resolve these tensions by emphasizing one of the three claims at the expense of the other two.

First, there are those scholars (Wilamowitz 1920, Zeller 1889, and Strauss 1952) who take (1) as the central element of Thrasymachus' thinking about justice. According to this view, Thrasymachus is an advocate of natural right who claims that it is just (by nature) that the strong rule over the weak. This interpretation stresses the similarities between Thrasymachus' arguments and the position Plato attributes to Callicles in the Gorgias.

A second group of scholars (Hourani 1962, and Grote 1850) emphasizes the importance of (2) and contends that Thrasymachus advocates a form of legalism. According to this interpretation, Thrasymachus is a relativist who denies that justice is anything beyond obedience to existing laws.

A third group (Kerferd 1947, Nicholson 1972) argues that (3) is the central element in Thrasymachus' thinking about justice. Thrasymachus therefore turns out to be an ethical egoist who stresses that justice is the good of another and thus incompatible with the pursuit of one's self-interest. Scholars in this group view Thrasymachus primarily as an ethical thinker and not as a political theorist.

In addition, there is a group of scholars (A.E. Taylor 1960, and Burnet 1964) who read Thrasymachus as an ethical nihilist. According to this view, Thrasymachus' project is to show that justice does not exist. Burnet writes in this context: '[Thrasymachus] is the real ethical counterpart to the cosmological nihilism of Gorgias.'

Others (Barney 2004 and Johnson 2005) have stressed that Thrasymachus should not be read as a philosopher who offers precise definitions of justice, but rather as a sociologist or political scientist who offers empirical observations that amount to a cynical commentary on those who follow a traditional, Hesiodic conception of justice.

Finally, there are a number of scholars who claim that Thrasymachus is a confused thinker. Cross and Woozley (1964) contend, for example, that Thrasymachus advances different criteria for justice 'without appreciating that they do not necessarily coincide.' This claim has been renewed by Everson (1998). J.P. Maguire (1971) argues that only some of the arguments in book I of the Republic are Thrasymachus' own, while other ideas are falsely attributed to Thrasymachus by Plato in order to prepare the ground for his own arguments.

3. Influence

In spite of the disagreement about how to interpret Thrasymachus' arguments in book I of the Republic, his ideas have been influential in ethical and political theory. In ethics, Thrasymachus' ideas have often been seen as the first fundamental critique of moral values. Thrasymachus' insistence that justice is nothing but the advantage of the stronger seems to support the view that moral values are socially constructed and are nothing but the reflection of the interests of particular political communities. Thrasymachus can thus be read as a foreshadowing of Nietzsche, who argues as well that moral values need to be understood as socially constructed entities. In political theory, Thrasymachus has often been seen as a spokesperson for a cynical realism that contends that might makes right. This view frequently associates Thrasymachus with the arguments Thucydides attributes to the Athenians in their negotiations with the island of Melos (History of the Peloponnesian War, Chapter XVII). Thrasymachus is therefore frequently portrayed as an early version of Machiavelli who argues in The Prince that the true statesman does not recognize any moral constrains in his pursuit of power. In the scholarship on Socrates, Thrasymachus is sometimes seen as an interlocutor who shows the limits of the Socratic elenchus. C.D.C. Reeve (1988) argues, for instance, that the conversation between Socrates and Thrasymachus illustrates that Socratic questioning cannot benefit a person like Thrasymachus, who categorically denies that justice is a virtue. Reeve contends that this limit of the elenctic method provided the impetus why Plato proceeded to modify Socrates' ethical principles in the remaining books of the Republic.

4. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Diels, Hermann. Die Fragmente der Vorsokratiker. Rev. Walther Kranz. Berlin: Weidmann, 1972-1973.
  • Plato. Republic. Trans. G.M.A. Grube (rev. C.D.C. Reeve). Indianapolis: Hackett, 1992.
  • The Older Sophists: A Complete Translation by Several Hands. Columbia SC: University of South Carolina Press, 1972.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Adkins, A.W.H.Merit and Responsibility: A Study in Greek Values Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1960.
  • Balot, R.K.Greed and Injustice in Classical Athens Princeton: Princeton University Press, 2001.
  • Barney, R."Callicles and Thrasymachus"Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
  • Burnet, J. Greek Philosophy. London: Macmillian, 1964.
  • Chapell,T.D.J. "The Virtues of Thrasymachus" Phronesis 38 (1993): 1-17
  • Chapell,T.D.J. "Thrasymachus and Definition" Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy 18 (2000): 101-107
  • Everson, S. "The Incoherence of Thrasymachus" Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy 16 (1998): 99-131.
  • Cross, R.C. and Woozley, A.D. Plato's Republic. A Philosophical Commentary. London: Macmillian, 1964.
  • Grote, G. A History of Greece. London: J. Murnay, 1888.
  • Hourani, C.F. "Thrasymachus' Definition of Justice in Plato's Republic" Phronesis 7 (1962): 110-120.
  • Johnson, C.Socrates and the Immoralists Lanham: Lexington Books, 2005
  • Kerferd, G.B. "The doctrine of Thrasymachus in Plato's Republic" Durham Univ. Journal 40 (1947): 19-27.
  • Kerferd, G. B. The Sophistic Movement. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1981.
  • Maguire, J.P. "Thrasymachus...or Plato?" Phronesis 16 (1971):142-163.
  • Nicholson, P.P. "Unravelling Thrasymachus' Argument in the Republic" Phronesis 19 (1974): 210-232.
  • O'Neill, B. "The Struggle for the Soul of Thrasymachus"Ancient Philosophy 8 (1988):167-85.
  • Reeve, C.D.C. "Socrates meets Thrasymachus" Archiv für Geschichte der Philosophie 67 (1985): 246-265.
  • Reeve, C.D.C. Philosopher-Kings. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1988.
  • Strauss, L. Natural Right and History. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1952.
  • Taylor, A.E. Plato, the Man and his Work. London: Methenn, 1960.
  • White, S.A."Thrasymachus the Diplomat"Classical Philology 90 (1995): 307-27.
  • Willamowitz-Moellendorff, U.v. Platon I. Berlin: Weidmann, 1920.
  • Zeller, E. Outlines of the History of Greek Philosophy. New York: H.Holt, 1889.

Author Information

Nils Rauhut
Coastal Carolina University
U. S. A.

Johann Wolfgang von Goethe (1749—1832)

GoetheGoethe defies most labels, and in the case of the label ‘philosopher’ he did so intentionally. “The scholastic philosophy,” in his opinion, “had, by the frequent darkness and apparent uselessness of its subject- matter, by its unseasonable application of a method in itself respectable, and by its too great extension over so many subjects, made itself foreign to the mass, unpalatable, and at last superfluous” (Goethe 1902, 1: 294). But it is nothing exceptional for a philosopher to disdain the character of what is passed along under the name philosophy by professional academics. If Diogenes, Montaigne, Nietzsche, Wittgenstein, Sartre, or Rorty, can be considered philosophers, then it may even be a rule that to reject the appellation is a condition of having earned it. That said, Goethe is certainly not a philosopher in the sense made popular in his day: a builder of self-grounding systems of thought. Neither is he a philosopher by today’s most common definitions: either a professional analyzer of arguments or a critic of contemporary cultural practices. The paradigm under which Goethe might be classified a philosopher is much older, recalling the ancient and then renaissance conception of the polymath, the man of great learning and wisdom, whose active life serves as the outward expression of his thinking.

In terms of influence, Goethe’s upon Germany is second only to Martin Luther’s. The periods of his dramatic and poetic writing –Sturm und Drang, romanticism, and classicism— simply are the history of the high-culture in Germany from the late eighteenth to the early nineteenth century. Philosophically, his influence is indelible, though not as wide-reaching. His formulation of an organic ontology left its mark on thinkers from Hegel to Wittgenstein; his theory of colors challenged the reigning paradigm of Newton’s optics; and his theory of morphology, that of Linnaeus’ biology.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Works
  2. Philosophical Background
  3. Scientific Background and Influence
  4. Morphology, Compensation, and Polarity
  5. Theory of Colors
  6. Philosophical Influence
  7. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
      1. German Editions of Goethe’s Works
      2. Letters and Conversations
      3. English Translations of Goethe’s Works
    2. Selected Secondary Scholarship
      1. Historical and Philosophical Context
      2. Science and Methodology
      3. Aesthetics, Politics, and Theology

1. Life and Works

Historical studies should generally avoid the error of thinking that the circumstances of a philosopher’s life necessitate their theoretical conclusions. With Goethe, however, his poetry, scientific investigations, and philosophical worldview are manifestly informed by his life, and are indeed intimately connected with his lived experiences. In the words of Georg Simmel, “…Goethe’s individual works gradually appear to take on less significance than his life as a whole. His life does not acquire the sense of a biography that strings together external phenomena, but is rather like the portrait of a singular vastness, depth and dynamism of existence, the pure expression of an internal vigor in its relation to the world, the spiritualization of an extraordinary sphere of reality,” (Simmel 2007, 85f).

Johann Wolfgang von Goethe was born August 28, 1749 in Frankfurt, Germany. His father was the Imperial Councillor Johann Kaspar Goethe (1710-1782) and his mother Katharina Elisabeth (Textor) Goethe (1731-1808). Goethe had four siblings, only one of whom, Cornelia, survived early childhood.

Goethe's early education was inconsistently directed by his father and sporadic tutors. He did, however, learn Greek, Latin, French, and Italian relatively well by the age of eight. In part to satisfy his father’s hope for material success, Goethe enrolled in law at Leipzig in 1765. There he gained a reputation within theatrical circles while attending the courses of C.F. Gellert. And there he gained notoriety for his extracurricular activities at what would become Faust’s haunt, Auerbach’s Keller. In 1766 he fell in love with Anne Catharina Schoenkopf (1746-1810) and wrote his joyfully exuberant collection of nineteen anonymous poems, dedicated to her simply with the title Annette.

After a case of tuberculosis and two years convalescence, Goethe moved to Stassburg in 1770 to finish his legal degree. There he met Johann Gottfried Herder (1744-1803), unofficial leader of the Sturm und Drang movement. Herder encouraged Goethe to read Homer, Ossian, and Shakespeare, whom the poet credits above all with his first literary awakening. Inspired by a new flame, this time Friederike Brion, he published the Neue Lieder (1770) and his Sesenheimer Lieder (1770-1771). Though set firmly on the path to poetry, he was promoted Licentitatus Juris in 1771 and returned to Frankfurt where with mixed success he opened a small law practice. Seeking greener pastures, he soon after moved to the more liberal city of Darmstadt. Along the road, so the story goes, Goethe obtained a copy of the biography of a noble highwayman from the German Peasants' War. Within the astounding span of six weeks, he had reworked it into the popular anti-establishment protest, Götz von Berlichingen (1773).

His next composition, Die Leiden des jungen Werther (1774), brought Goethe nearly instant worldwide acclaim. The plot of the book is mostly a synthesis of his friendships with Charlotte Buff (1753-1828) and her fiancé Johann Christian Kestner (1741-1800), and the suicide of Goethe’s friend Karl Wilhelm Jerusalem (1747-1772). It remains the archetype of the Sturm und Drang’s elevation of emotion over reason, disdain for social proprieties, and exhortation for action in place of reflection. Besides Werther, Goethe composed Die Hymnen (among them Ganymed, Prometheus and Mahomets Gesang), and several shorter dramas, among them Götter, Helden und Wieland (1774), and Clavigo (1774).

On the strength of his reputation, Goethe was invited in 1775 to the court of then eighteen-year-old Duke Carl August (1757-1828), who would later become Grand Duke of Saxe-Weimar-Eisenach. Although Weimar was then a village of only six thousand residents, it was in the process of a cultural revolution thanks to the foresight and aesthetic vision of Duchess Anna Amalia (1739-1807), mother of the Duke and matron of the “Court of the Muses.” Goethe became enveloped in court life, where he could turn his limitless curiosity to an astonishing range of civic activities. As court-advisor and special counsel to the Duke, he took directorship of the mining concern, the finance ministry, the war  and roads commission, the local theater, not to mention construction of the beautiful Park-am-Ilm. He was eventually granted nobility by Emperor Joseph II, and became Geheimrat of Weimar in 1782.

From 1786 to 1788 Goethe took his Italienische Resie, in part out of his growing enthusiasm for the Winckelmannian rebirth of classicism. There he met the artists Kaufmann and Tischbein, and also Christiane Vulpius (1765–1816), with whom he held a rather scandalous love affair until their eventual marriage in 1806.

Although Goethe had first met Friedrich Schiller (1759-1805) in 1779, when the latter was a medical student in Karlsruhe, there was hardly an immediate friendship between them. When Schiller came to Weimar in 1787, Goethe dismissively considered Schiller an impetuous though undeniably talented upstart. As Goethe wrote to his friend Körner in 1788, “His entire being is just set up differently than mine; our intellectual capacities appear essentially at odds.” After some years of maturation on Schiller’s part and of mellowing on Goethe’s, the two found their creative spirits in harmony. In 1794, the pair became intimate friends and collaborators, and began nothing less than the most extraordinary period of literary production in German history. Working alongside Schiller, Goethe finally completed his Bildungsroman, the great Wilhelm Meisters Lehrjahre (1795-6), as well as his epic Hermann und Dorothea (1796-7) and several balladic pieces. Schiller, for his part, completed the Wallenstein trilogy (1799), Maria Stuart (1800), Die Jungfrau von Orleans (1801), Die Braut von Messina (1803) and Wilhelm Tell (1804). To Goethe’s great sorrow and regret, Schiller died at the height of his powers on April 29, 1805. Of their collaboration’s historical importance, Alfred Bates commemorates, “Schiller and Goethe have ever been inseparable in the minds of their countrymen, and have reigned as twin stars in the literary firmament. If Schiller does not hold the first place he is more beloved, though Goethe is more admired,” (Bates 1906, 11: 75).

Johann Wolfgang von Goethe died on March 22, 1832 in Weimar, having finally finished Faust the previous year. His famous last words were a request that his servant let in “more light.” The prince of poets, Goethe was laid to rest in the Fürstengruft of the Historischer Friedhof in Weimar, side by side with his friend Schiller.

2. Philosophical Background

The Kultfigur of Goethe as the unspoiled and uninfluenced genius is doubtless over-romanticized. Goethe himself gave rise to this myth, both in his conversations with others and in his own quasi-biographical work, Dichtung und Wahrheit (1811-1833). About his study of the history of philosophy, he writes, “one doctrine or opinion seemed to me as good as another, so far, at least, as I was capable of penetrating into it,” (Goethe 1902, 182). Albert Schweitzer, usually even-handed in his attributions, writes, “Goethe borrows nothing from any of the philosophies with which he is in contact. Thanks, however, to his conscientious study of the thought of others, he attains an ever clearer grasp of his own ideas,” (Schweitzer 1949, 70).

Goethe’s way of reading was neither that of the scholar seeking out arguments to analyze nor that of the historian curious about the ideas of the great minds. No disciple of any particular philosopher or system, he instead borrows in a syncretic way from a number of different and even opposing thought systems in the construction of his Weltanschauung. And whenever particular subjects could not be put to practical use, Goethe’s attention quickly moved on. In a rather telling recollection, Goethe characterizes his philosophy lectures thusly, “At first I attended my lectures assiduously and faithfully, but the philosophy would not enlighten me at all. In logic it seemed strange to me that I had so to tear asunder, isolate, and, as it were, destroy, those operations of the mind which I had performed with the greatest ease from my youth upwards, and this in order to see into the right use of them. Of the thing itself, of the world, and of God, I thought I knew about as much as the professor himself; and, in more places than one, the affair seemed to me to come into a tremendous strait. Yet all went on in tolerable order till towards Shrovetide, when, in the neighborhood of Professor Winkler's house on the Thomas Place, the most delicious fritters came hot out of the pan just at the hour of lecture,” (Goethe 1902, 205). Philosophy apparently held just slightly less interest than good pastry. Notwithstanding this estimation, indelible philosophical influences are nevertheless discernible.

For many intellectuals in Goethe’s generation, Rousseau (1712-78) represented the struggle against the Cartesian mechanistic world view. Rousseau’s elevation of the emotional and instinctual aspects of human subjectivity galvanized the traditional German Wanderlust into a far reaching cry to ‘return to nature’ in terms of a longing for pre-civilized society and pre-Enlightenment efforts to harmonize with rather than conquer nature. Goethe felt this unity with nature keenly in his Sturm und Drang period, something equally evident in Werther’s desire for aesthetic wholeness and in his emotional outbursts. From 1784 to 1804, there is a notable decline in enthusiasm for Rousseau’s privileging emotion over reason, though never an explicit rejection. Some scholars attribute this to Goethe’s participation in the sorts of civic bureaucracies that Rousseau so lamented in modern life. But it is clear that there are philosophical reasons besides these practical ones. Goethe’s classical turn in these years is marked by his view that the fullest life was one that balanced passion and duty, creativity and regulation. Only through the interplay of these oppositions, which Rousseau never came to recognize, could one attain classical perfection.

Although educated in a basically Leibnizian-Wolffian worldview, it was Spinoza (1632-77) from whom Goethe adopted the view that God is both immanent with the world and identical with it. While there is little to suggest direct influence on other aspects of his thought, there are certain curious similarities. Both think that ethics should consist in advice for influencing our characters and eventually to making us more perfect individuals. And both hold that happiness means an inner, almost stoically tranquil superiority over the ephemeral troubles of the world.

Kant (1724-1804) was doubtless the most famous living philosopher of Goethe’s youth. Yet Goethe only came to read him seriously in the late 1780s, and even then only with the help of Karl Reinhold (1757-1823). While he shared with Kant the rejection of externally imposed norms of ethical behavior, his reception was highly ambivalent. In a commemoration for Wieland (1773-1813) he asserts that the Kritik der reinen Vernunft (1781/7) is “a dungeon which restrains our free and joyous excursions into the field of experience.” Like Aristotle before him, Goethe felt the only proper starting point for philosophy was the direct experience of natural objects. Kant’s foray into the transcendental conditions of the possibility of such an experience seemed to him an unnecessary circumvention of precisely that which we are by nature equipped to undertake. The critique of reason was like a literary critique: both could only pale in value to the original creative activity. Concerning Kant’s Kritik der praktischen Vernunft (1788), Goethe was convinced that dicta of pure practical reason, no matter how convincing theoretically, had little power to transform character. Perhaps with Kant’s ethics in mind, he wrote, “Thinking is easy, acting is difficult, and to put one's thoughts into action is the most difficult thing in the world.” And “Knowing is not enough; we must apply. Willing is not enough; we must do.” On the other hand, a letter to Eckermann of April 11, 1827, indicates that he considers Kant to be the most eminent of modern philosophers. And he certainly appreciated Kant's Kritik der Urteilskraft (1790) for having shown that nature and art each have their ends within themselves purposively rather than as final causes imposed from without.

Influenced in part by Herder’s conception of Einfühlen, Goethe formulated his own morphological method (see below). More the Kantian than Goethe, Herder’s belief in Über den Ursprung der Sprache (1772) that language could be explained naturalistically as a creative impulse within human development rather than a divine gift influenced Goethe’s theoretical work on poetry. And the trace of Herder’s claims about the equal worth of historical epochs and cultures can still be seen in the eclectic art collection in Goethe’s house on Weimar’s Frauenplan.

3. Scientific Background and Influence


Goethe considered his scientific contributions as important as his literary achievements. While few scholars since have shared that contention, there is no doubting the sheer range of Goethe’s scientific curiosity. In his youth, Goethe’s poetry and dramatic works featured the romantic belief in the ‘creative energy of nature’ and evidenced a certain fascination with alchemy. But court life in Weimar brought Goethe for the first time in contact with experts outside his literary comfort zone. His directorship of the silver-mine at nearby Ilmenau introduced him to a group of mineralogists from the Freiburg Mining Academy, led by Johann Carl Voigt (1752-1821). His 1784 discovery of the intermaxillary bone was a result of his study with Jena anatomist Justus Christian Loder (1753-1832). Increasingly fascinated by botany, he studied the pharmacological uses of plants under August Karl Batsch (1761-1802) at the University of Jena, and began an extensive collection of his own. He grew dissatisfied with the system of Linnaeus as an artificial taxonomy of plants, considering it “a shade of a great harmony, which one must study as a whole, otherwise each individual is a dead letter,” (Letter to Knebel, 17 November, 1784).

There is a passionate ambivalence about Goethe’s scientific reputation. He has alternately been received as a universal man of learning whose methods and intuitions have contributed positively to many aspects of scientific discourse, or else denounced as a dilettante incapable of understanding the figures— Linnaeus and Isaac Newton—against whom his work is a feeble attempt to revolt. Goethe’s scientific treatises were neglected by many in the nineteenth century as the amateurish efforts of an otherwise great poet, one who should have stayed within the arena that best suited him. Positivists of the early twentieth century virtually ignored him. Erich Heller claims Goethe “made no contribution to scientific progress or technique,” (Heller 1952, 7). On the other hand, some of the great scientific minds have expressed enthusiastic respect and even approval of Goethe’s contributions, among them Helmholtz, Einstein, and Planck (Cf. Stephenson 1995).

4. Morphology, Compensation, and Polarity

In Goethe’s day, the reigning systematic botanical theory in Europe was that of Carl Linnaeus (1707-1778). Plants were classified according to their relation to each other into species, genera, and kingdom. As an empirical method, Linnaeus’s taxonomy ordered external characteristics — size, number, and location of individual organs — as generic traits. The problem for Goethe was two-fold. Although effective as an organizational schema, it failed to distinguish organic from inorganic natural objects. And by concentrating only on the external characteristics of the plant, it ignored the inner development and transformation characteristic of living things generally. Goethe felt that the exposition of living objects required the same account of inner nature as it did for the account of the inner unity of a person.

Goethe believed that all living organisms bore an inner physiognomic ‘drive to formation’ or Bildungstrieb. In his “First Sketch of a General Introduction into Comparative Anatomy, Starting from Osteology” (1795), Goethe discussed a law binding the action of the Bildungstrieb, that “nothing can be added to one part without subtracting from another, and conversely,” (Goethe 1961-3, 17: 237). This notion of ‘compensation’ bears a likeness to the laws of vital force put forward by Johann Friedrich Blumenbach (1752-1840) and Carl Friedrich Kielmeyer (1765-1844) in the early 1790s. But whereas their versions dealt with the generation and corruption of living beings, Goethe sought the common limitations imposed on organic beings by external nature.


Whereas his earlier romanticism considered nature the raw material on which human emotions could be imparted, Goethe’s studies in botany, mineralogy, and anatomy revealed to him certain common patterns in the development and modifications of natural forms. The name he gave to this new manner of inquiry was ‘morphology’. No static concept, morphology underwent its own metamorphosis throughout Goethe’s career. Morphology is first named as such in Goethe’s notes of 1796. But he only fully lays out the position as an account of the form and transformation of organisms in the 1817 Zur Morphologie. He continued to publish articles in his journal “On Science in General, On Morphology in Particular” from 1817 to 1824. Goethe’s key contention here is that every living being undergoes change according to a compensatory dynamic between the successive stages of its development. In the plant, for example, this determination of each individual member by the whole arises insofar as every organ is built according to the same basic form. As he wrote to Herder on May 17, 1787:

It has become apparent to me that within the organ that we usually address as ‘leaf’ there lies hidden the true Proteus that can conceal and manifest itself in every shape. Any way you look at it, the plant is always only leaf, so inseparably joined with the future germ that one cannot think the one without the other. […]With this model and the key to it, one can then go on inventing plants forever that must follow lawfully; which, even if they don’t exist, still could exist…

Goethe’s morphology, in opposition to the static taxonomy of Linnaeus, studied these perceptible limitations not merely in order to classify plants in a tidy fashion, but as instances of natural generation for the sake of intuiting the inner working of nature itself, whole and entire. Since all organisms undergo a common succession of internal forms, we can intuitively uncover within these changes an imminent ideal of development, which Goethe names the ‘originary phenomenon’ or Urphänomen. These pure exemplars of the object in question are not some abstracted Platonic Idea of the timeless and unchanging essence of the thing, but “the final precipitate of all experiences and experiments, from which it can ever be isolated. Rather it reveals itself in a constant succession of manifestations,” (Goethe 1981, 13: 25). The Urphänomen thus offer a sort of “guiding thread through the labyrinth of diverse living forms,” (Goethe 1961-3, 17: 58), which thereby reveals the true unity of the forms of nature in contrast to the artificially static and lifeless images of Linneaus’ system. Through the careful study of natural objects in terms of their development, and in fact only in virtue of it, we are able to intuit morphologically the underlying pattern of what the organic object is and must become. “When, having something before me that has grown, I inquire after its genesis and measure the process as far back as I can, I become aware of a series of stages, which, though I cannot actually see them in succession, I can present to myself in memory as a kind of ideal whole,” (Goethe 1947ff, I/10: 131).

The morphological method is thus a combination of careful empirical observation and a deeper intuition into the idea that guides the pattern of changes over time as an organism interacts with its environment. Natural observation is the necessary first step of science; but because the senses can only attend to outer forms, a full account of the object also requires an intuition that apprehends an object with the ‘eyes of the mind’. Morphology reveals, “the laws of transformation according to which nature produces one part through another and achieves the most diversified forms through the modification of a single organ,” (Goethe 1961-3, 17: 22). While the visible transformations are apparent naturalistically, the inner laws by which they are necessary are not. They are, in Goethe’s word, dämonisch, apparent intuitively but unable to be explicated more concretely by means of the understanding.

Whereas Linneaus’ taxonomy only considered the sensible qualities of the object, Goethe believed a sufficient explanation must address that object in terms of organic wholeness and development. To do that, the scientist needs to describe the progressive modification of a single part of an object as its modification over time relates to the whole of which it is the part. Considering the leaf as an example of this Urphänomen, Goethe traced its metamorphosis from a seed into the stem, then leaves, then flowers, and finally its stamen or pistil. This continuous development was described by Goethe as an ‘intensification’ or Steigerung of the original form.

The oppositional tension between the creative force and the compensatory limitations within all living things exemplifies the notion of ‘polarity’ or Polarität. In his 1790 essay, “The Metamorphosis of Plants,” Goethe represented the intensification of a plant as the result of the interaction between the nutritive forces of the plant and the organic form of the primal leaf. Polarity between a freely creative impulse and an objectively structuring law is what allows the productive restraint of pure creativity and at the same time the playfulness and innovation of formal rules. Polarity also plays a marked role in Goethe’s Farbenlehre (see below), as the principle of interplay between light and darkness out of which the Urphänomen of color is exhibited. “With light poise and counterpoise, nature oscillates within her prescribed limits, yet thus arise all the varieties and conditions of the phenomena which are presented to us in space and time,” (Goethe 1970, xxxix).

Goethe’s theories of morphology, polarity, and compensation each have their roots in his dramatic and poetic writings. But rather than a fanciful application of an aesthetic doctrine to the nature, Goethe believed that the creativity great artists, insofar as they are great, was a reflection of the purposiveness of nature. After all, “masterpieces were produced by man in accordance with the same true and natural laws as the masterpieces of nature,” (Goethe 1961-3, 11: 435–6). Goethe’s classicism features a similarly polarized intertwining of the unbridled creativity of the artistic drives and the formal rules of technique. As with a plant, the creative forces of life must be guided, trained, and restricted, so that in place of something wild and ungainly can stand a balanced structure which achieves, in both organic nature and in the work of art, its full intensification in beauty. As the work of the botanist is to trace the morphology of an individual according to an ideal Urphänomen, so does it fall to the classical author to intensify his characters within the contextualized polarity of the plot in a way simultaneously unique and yet typical. The early drafts of Torquato Tasso (begun in the 1780s), for example, reveal its protagonist as a veritable force of nature, pouring out torrential feelings upon a conservative and repressed external world. By the time of the published version in 1790, the Sturm und Drang character of Tasso is polarized against the aristocratically reposed and reasonable character of Antonio. Only in conjunction with Antonio can Tasso come into classical fullness and perfection. As the interplay of polarities in nature is the principle of natural wholeness, so is it the principle of equipoise in the classical drama. Polarities are also visible in Wilhelm Meister’s Lehrjahr (1795-6). Again in marked contrast to an earlier version of the text, in the final version Wilhelm’s romantic love of art and theatre is now just one piece of his coming-into-himself, which requires its polar opposite: the restraint inculcated within a conservatively aristocratic society. Only from the polarized tension does his drive to self-formation achieve intensification and eventually classical perfection.

5. Theory of Colors

“As to what I have done as a poet... I take no pride in it... but that in my century I am the only person who knows the truth in the difficult science of colors – of that, I say, I am not a little proud, and here I have a consciousness of a superiority to many,” (Goethe 1930, 302). Coming from the preeminent literary figure of his age, Goethe’s remarkable statement reveals to what extent he considered the Farbenlehre (1810) his life’s true work. At the same time, it was the source of perhaps his greatest disappointment. Like his work on morphology, his theory of colors fell on mostly deaf ears.

As his morphology targeted the system of Linnaeus, Goethe’s Farbenlehre challenged what was then and among the general public still remains the leading view of optics, that of Isaac Newton (1642-1727). However, most of Goethe’s vitriol was not directed at Newton himself, but the dismissive attitudes of his adherents, who would not so much as entertain the possibility that their conceptual framework was inadequate. He compares Newton’s optics, “to an old castle, which was at first constructed by its architect with youthful precipitation […] The same system was pursued by his successors and heirs: their increased wants within, and harassing vigilance of their opponents without, and various accidents compelled them in some place to build nearby, in others in connection with the fabric, and thus to extend the original plan,” (Goethe 1970, xlii). Thus, while Goethe esteems Newton as a redoubtable genius, his issue is with those half-witted apologists who effectively corrupted that very same edifice they fought to defend. His aim is accordingly to, “dismantle it from gable and roof downwards; so that the sun may at last shine into the old nest of rats and owls…” (Goethe 1970, xliii).

As was the case with Linnaeus, Goethe’s guiding criticism of Newton concerned his ostensibly artificial method. Through Newton’s famous experiments with prismatic phenomenon, he discovered that pure light already contained within itself all the colors available to the human visual spectrum. The refraction of pure white light projected at a prism produces the seven individual colors. Pragmatically, this allowed Newton to quantify the angular bending of light beams and to predict which colors would be produced at a given frequency. That frequency could be calculated simply by accounting for the distance between the light source and the prism and again the distance from the prism to the surface upon which the color was projected.

But by reducing the thing itself to its perceptible qualities, the Newtonians had made a grave methodological mistake. The derivative colors produced by the prismatic experiments are identified with the spectrum that appears in the natural world. But since the light has been artificially manipulated to fit the constraints of the experiment, there is no prima facie reason to think that natural light would feature the same qualities. Sending a beam of light through a turbid prismatic medium ─ one among a nearly infinite variety of media ─ produced a reliably quantifiable set of results, but by no means either the only or even an obviously preferable set. In Goethe’s words, “[Newton] commits the error of taking as his premise a single phenomenon, artificial at that, building a hypothesis on it, and attempting to explain with it the most numerous and unlimited phenomena,” (Goethe 1981, 13: 50).

Goethe’s alternative relies upon his ideas of morphology and polarity. Just as the study of a plant had to proceed from the empirical observation of a great variety of particulars in order to intuit the Urphänomen that was common to all of them, so too should a Farbenlehre proceed from as great a variety of natural observations as possible. Whereas Newton universalizes from a controlled and artificial experiment, Goethe thinks “[i]t is useless to attempt to express the nature of a thing abstractedly. Effects we can perceive, and a complete history of those effects would, in fact, sufficiently define the nature of the thing itself. We should try in vain to describe a man’s character, but let his acts be collected and an idea of the character will be presented to us. The colors are acts of lights; its active and passive modifications: thus considered we may expect from them some explanation respecting life itself,” (Goethe 1970, xxxvii). These ‘acts’ of light reveal the same coordinate tension found in the rest of polarized nature. A light beam is no static thing with a substantial ontological status, but an oppositional tension that we perceive only relationally. Through careful observation of their interplay alone do we apprehend color. As defined by Goethe, “color is an elementary phenomenon in nature adapted to the sense of vision; a phenomenon which, like all others, exhibits itself by separation and contrast, by commixture and union, by augmentation and neutralization, by communication and dissolution: under these general terms its nature may be best comprehended,” (Goethe 1970, liv). Color arises from the polarity of light and darkness. Darkness is not the absence of light, as both Newton and most contemporary theorists believe, but its essential antipode, and thereby an integral part of color.

Through a series of experiments on his thesis that color is really the interplay of light and dark, Goethe discovered a peculiarity that seemed to confute the Newtonian system. If Newton is right that color is the result of dividing pure light, then there should be only one possible order to the spectrum, according to the frequency of the divided light. But there are clearly two ways to produce a color spectrum: with a light beam projected in a dark room, and with a shadow projected within a lighted room. Something bright, seen through something turbid, appears yellow. If the turbidity of the medium gradually increases, then what had appeared as yellow passes over into yellowish-red and eventually into bright-red as its frequency proportionally decreases. Something dark, seen through something turbid, appears blue; with a decreasing turbity, it appears violent. The color produced also depends upon the color of the material on which the light or shadow is cast. If a white light is projected above a dark boundary, the light extends a blue-violet edge into the dark area. A shadow projected above a light boundary, on the other hand, yields a red-yellow edge. When the distances between the projection and the surface are increased, the boundaries will eventually overlap. Done in a lighted room, the result of the overlap is green. The same procedure conducted in a dark room, however, produces magenta. If Newton was correct that only the bending of the light beam affects the given color, then neither the relative brightness of the room, the color of the background, nor the introduction of shadow should have altered the resultant color.

Reversing the artificial conditions of Newton’s original experiment, Goethe reformulated the problem of color to account for the role of both the observer and his or her context. Alongside the physical issues involved with optics, Goethe thus also realized the aesthetic conditions in the human experience of color. The perceptual capacities of the brain and eye, and their situatedness in a real world of real experience must be considered essential conditions of how colors could be seen. But while his observations of the double color-spectrum are intriguing, Goethe’s physiognomic speculations as to how the subject renders perceptual experience are, even by his contemporary standards, quite amateur. His reification of darkness, moreover, remains difficult to conceptualize coherently, much less to accept.

Although almost entirely ignored in his own time, and even undermined by his once and former collaborator, Schopenhauer, Goethe’s theory did win some later acclaim. His call to recognize the role of the subject in the perception of color does have positive echoes in the neo-Kantian theories of perception of Lange, Helmholtz, and Boscovich. Traces can also be found in twentieth century thinkers as divergent as Wittgenstein and Merleau-Ponty. Despite the fact that almost no serious thinker has ever counted themselves a strict adherent of Goethe’s Farbenlehre, the theory has had a remarkable persistence. Part of the explanation for this may be the obvious superiority of Goethe’s prose; his text is one of very few scientific treatises that can be read by amateurs with pleasure. Part is also due to decline of Newtonian physics generally.

6. Philosophical Influence



Goethe’s general influence on European culture is gargantuan. In 19th century Germany alone, authors like Heine, Novalis, Jean Paul, Tieck, Hoffman, and Eichendorff all owe tremendous debts to Götz and Werther. Thomas Carlyle, Ralph Waldo Emerson, Mark Twain, Kurt Tucholsky, Thomas Mann, James Joyce and too many others to name have since paid tribute to the master from Weimar. Composers like Mozart, Liszt, and Mahler dedicated works to Goethe’s drama, while Beethoven himself mused that the greatest musical accomplishment possible would be a perfect musical expression Faust. Goethe’s ideas have truly launched a thousand ships upon their cultural and intellectual expeditions. Philosophically, the lineage is comparatively more defined.

In his mature years, Goethe was to witness the philosophical focus in Germany shift from Kant to the Idealists. But by the early 1800s, Goethe was too convinced of the worth of his own ideas to be much influenced by what he considered philosophical fashions. Despite his proximity to and considerable influence at the University of Jena, Goethe had little positive contact with Fichte (1762-1814), who arrived there in 1794. Neither Fichte’s Pecksniffian sermonizing nor nearly illegible compositional style would have endeared him personally to the poet. Goethe’s more ambivalent attitude toward Schelling (1775-1854) vacillated between an approval of his appreciation for the deep mysteriousness of nature and an aversion to his futile attempt to solve it by means of an abstracted and artificial system. Schelling’s Naturphilosophie, like Goethe’s morphology, views nature as a constant organic development. But where Goethe saw polarity as an essential part of growth, Schelling understood dualities generally as something to be overcome in the intuition of the ‘absolute’.

Goethe’s relationship with Hegel (1770-1831) was both more direct and more influential. Most overtly, Hegel’s logic draws upon Goethe’s conception of metamorphosis. A letter from Hegel to Goethe on February 20, 1821 reads:

The simple and abstract, what you quite aptly call the archetypal phenomenon, this you put first, and then show the concrete phenomena as arising through the participation of still other influences and circumstances, and you direct the whole process in such a way that the sequence proceeds from the simple determining factors to the composite ones, and, thus arranged, something complex appears in all its clarity through this decomposition. To seek out the archetypal phenomenon, to free it from other extraneous chance surroundings — to grasp it abstractly, as we call it — this I consider to be a task for a great spiritual sense for nature, just as I consider that procedure altogether to be what is truly scientific in gaining knowledge in this field.

For Hegel, famously, a natural object has achieved its greatest perfection when it brings forth its full implicit content in explicit conceptual representation. Because the intellectual world ranks higher than the material, a phenomenology of the whole must observe the gradual unfolding of all possible logical forms from mere sense certainty through the self-recognition of consciousness to absolute knowing. To no small degree, Hegel’s criticism of Kant’s lifeless schematism of the understanding was foreshadowed by Goethe, who wrote, “Reason has to do with becoming, understanding with what has become. The former does not bother with the question, ‘what use?’; the latter does not ask ‘whence?’. Reason takes pleasure in development; understanding wishes to hold everything fixed so that it can exploit it,” (Goethe 1907, 555). Hegel’s formulation of Begriff, which designates the inner plan of the development of an object, was not wholly unlike Goethe’s Urphänomen (see below). The Hegelian dialectic, as an unveiling the movement of the concept would then correspond to the morphology. The problem, for Goethe, was that Hegel’s attempt to articulate wholeness began by the analysis of the logical concept of Being in the Logik and by the sublimation of the sense-certain observation of natural objects in the Phänomenologie, which for Goethe unjustifiably overlooks precisely that which it was the task of science to understand: the development of the natural forms of life, of which the mind is certainly a central one, but indeed only one example. As Goethe writes in a letter to Soret on February 13, 1829, “Nature is always true, always serious, always severe; it is always right, and mistakes and errors are always the work of men.” Similar to his critique of Kant, then, Goethe accused Hegel of creating a grand and abstract system to explain a phenomenon which in both ordinary life and in scientific observation could simply be assumed. Nature presents itself to the epistemologically reflective and to the naïve equally and without preference.

Arthur Schopenhauer’s (1788-1860) mother Johanna became fast friends with Goethe and his lover Christiane Vulpius when she moved to Weimra in 1804. His sister Adele was the lifelong confident of Ottile Pogwisch, who married Goethe’s and Christiane’s son Auguste. But for the young Arthur, due in part to an unavoidable clash of personalities, the established Goethe had little patience. Goethe recognized his intelligence early on, but declined to provide him a letter of recommendation to the university at Göttingen and offered him only a tepid letter of introduction to the classicist Friedrich August Wolf in Berlin. Schopenhauer’s dissertation, however, interested Goethe very much. In the winter of 1813-4, Goethe and Schopenhauer were engaged in extensive philosophical conversation concerning the former’s anti-Newtonian Farbenlehre (see below), out of which grew the latter’s Über das Sehen und die Farben in 1815. When Schopenhauer sent him the manuscript in the hopes of a recommendation, he grew impatient with the elder’s reticence to take his efforts sufficiently seriously. In truth, Schopenhauer’s work largely revealed Goethe’s as a failed attempt to overcome Newtonian visual theory, a fact which wounded Goethe deeply. Goethe followed Schopenhauer’s career with interest, however, and generally praised Die Welt als Wille und Vorstellung. It remains a question, though, whether Goethe ever read the book carefully since scant reference to its ideas can be found.

Like that of his Erzieher Schopenhauer, Nietzsche’s (1844-1900) relationship with Goethe’s thought was deeply ambivalent. Nietzsche often admired Goethe as emblematic of a healthy, fully-formed individual. Goethe is said to be “the last German for whom I feel reverence,” (Nietzsche, Twilight of the Idols, “Skirmishes of an Untimely Man,” section 51). Nietzsche’s early contention that the tragic age of culture began only with the fortuitous interaction of the Apollonian and Dionysian drives bears a similarity to Goethe’s classical understanding of art as a tensional polarity between the blindly creative will and the constraint of formal rules. Yet Nietzsche takes Goethe to task for having invested too much in Winckelmann’s attribution of ‘Heiterkeit’ to classical antiquity and thereby for having ignored its deeply irrational underside. Moreover, Nietzsche’s ontology, if indeed he had one, is like Goethe’s in its rejection of static atomic substances and in its attempt to conceive an intrinsically agonistic process of becoming as the true character of the world. Similar, too, to Goethe’s ‘intensification’ principle, Nietzsche’s notoriously ambiguous ‘Will to Power’ characterizes the dynamic process by which entities ‘become what they are’ by struggling against oppositional limitations that are at the same time the necessary condition for growth. Due to this shared ontological outlook, Goethe and Nietzsche both thought contemporary science was constricted by an outdated conception of substance and, as a result, mechanistic modes of explanation should be reformulated to account for the dynamic character of nature. Despite these commonalities, Nietzsche jettisoned Goethe’s Bildungstrieb for an overarching drive–not to expression or growth within formal constraint—but for overcoming, for power.


Finally, Wittgenstein’s (1889-1951) claim that things which cannot be put into propositional form might nevertheless be shown bears a family resemblance to Goethe’s formulation of the daimonisch. But where Wittgenstein removes the proverbial ladder on which he ascends to his intuitions about the relation between logic and the world, thereby reducing what cannot be bound by the rules of logic as nonsensical, Goethe believed he could communicate what were admittedly ineffable Urphänomene in a non-propositional way, through the feelings evoked by drama. There is, moreover, a distinct similarity in Goethe’s and Wittgenstein’s views on the proper task of philosophy. Its aim, for both, can never be accomplished, once and for all, by means of ‘the right argument’. Argumentation, explanation, and demonstration only go so far in their attempt to unravel the mysteries of the world. “Philosophy simply puts everything before us; it fails to deduce anything,” (Wittgenstein, Philosophical Investigations, 126).

Philosophy’s role in our life should guide us to be reflective people, ever ready to critique inherited dogmas, and always ready to revise our hypotheses in light of new observations. Goethe, through his ceaseless energy, limitless fascination with the world as it was presented to him, and his perpetual willingness to test his convictions against new evidence, carries a timeless appeal to philosophers, not because he demonstrated or explained what it meant to live philosophically, but because, through the example of the course of his life, he showed it.

7. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

i. German Editions of Goethe’s Works

  • Akademie-Ausgabe: Werke, edited under the Institut für Deutsche Sprache und Literatur der Deutschen Akademie der Wissenschaften zu Berlin (Berlin: Akademie-Verlag, 1952ff).
  • Berliner Ausgabe: Poetische Werke. Kunsttheoretische Schriften und Übersetzungen, edited by the Bearbeiter-Kollektiv unter Leitung von Siegfried Seidel et al., 22 Volumes (Berlin/Weimar: Aufbau-Verlag, 1965-78).
  • Die Schriften zur Naturwissenschaft, edited by Kuhn et al. (Weimar: Deutschen Akademie der Naturforscher, 1947ff).
  • DTV-Gesamtausgabe: Sämtliche Werke: Nach den Texten der Gedenkausgabe des Artemis-Verlages, edited by Peter Boerner, 45 Volumes (München: Deutscher Taschenbuch Verlag, 1961-63).
  • Frankfurter Ausgabe: Sämtliche Werke. Briefe, Tagebücher und Gespräche, edited by Dieter Borchmeyer et al., 40 volumes in 2 divisions (Frankfurt a. M.: Deutscher Klassiker Verlag, 1985ff.).
  • Hamburger Ausgabe: Werke Hamburger Ausgabe in 14 Bänden, edited by Erich Trunz (Hamburg: Chr. Wegner, 1948-60; Reprinted, C. H. Beck, 1981).
  • Maximen und Reflexionen, edited by Max Hecker (Weimar: Schriften der Goethe Gesellschaft, 1907).
  • Münchner Ausgabe: Sämtliche Werke nach Epochen seines Schaffens, edited by Karl Richter et al., 20 volumes (München: C. Hanser, 1985-1998).
  • Weimarer Ausgabe (Sophienausgabe): Goethes Werke, edited under the sponsorship of Großherzogin Sophie von Sachsen, 143 Volumes in 4 divisions (Weimar: H. Böhlau, 1887-1919; Reprinted München: Deutscher Taschenbuch Verlag, 1987).
  • ii. Letters and Conversations

ii. Letters and Conversations

  • Eckermann, J.P., Gespräche mit Goethe in den letzten Jahren seines Lebens: 1823-1832, 3 Volumes (Leipzig: Geiger, 1836-1848).
  • Goethes Briefe: Hamburger Ausgabe, edited by Karl Robert Mandelkow, 4 Volumes (Hamburg, 1962-67 [Post-1972 Publication Site: München: Beck, 1972ff.).
  • Goethe: Begegnungen und Gespräche, edited by Ernst und Renate Grumach, 14 Volumes (Berlin: De Gruyter, 1965-2011).

iii. English Translations of Goethe’s Works

  • Conversations of Goethe with Johann Peter Eckermann, translated by John Oxenford (London: J.M. Dent & Sons, 1930).
  • Theory of Colors, translated by C.L. Eastlake (Boston: MIT Press, 1970).
  • Truth and Fiction Relating to my Life, translated by John Oxenford (Boston: Simonds & Co., 1902).

b. Selected Secondary Scholarship

i. Historical and Philosophical Context

  • Bates, A. (ed.), The Drama: Its History, Literature and Influence on Civilization, 20 vols. (London: Historical Publishing Company, 1906).
  • Borchmeyer, D., Goethe: Der Zeitbürger (München/Wien: Hanser, 1999).
  • Boyle, N., Goethe: The Poet and the Age (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1991).
  • Breithaupt, F., Jenseits der Bilder: Goethes Politik der Wahrnehmung (Freiburg im Breisgau: Rombach, 2000).
  • Breithaupt, F., et al. (eds.), Goethe and Wittgenstein: Seeing the World’s Unity in its Variety (Frankfurt a.M.: Peter Lang, 2003).
  • Bruford, W.H., Culture and Society in Classical Weimar: 1775-1806 (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1962).
  • Cassirer, E., Goethe und die geschichtliche Welt (Repr. Hamburg: Meiner, 1932).
  • Hildebrandt, G., Goethes Naturerkenntnis (Hamburg: Stromverlag, 1949).
  • Heller, E., The Disinherited Mind: Essays in Modern German Literature and Thought (Harmondsworth: Penguin Books, 1952).
  • Hinderer, W., Goethe und das Zeitalter der Romantik (Würzburg: Königshausen & Neumann, 2002).
  • Hofman, P., Goethes Theologie (Paderborn: Schöningh, 2001).
  • Lauxtermann, P., Schopenhauer's Broken World-View: Colours and Ethics between Kant and Goethe (Dordrecht: Kluwer, 2000).
  • Möckel, C., Anschaulichkeit des Wissens und kulturelle Sinnstiftung: Beiträge aus Lebensphilosophie, Phänomenologie und symbolischem Idealismus zu einer Goetheschen Fragestellung (Berlin: Logos, 2003).
  • Nicholls, A.J., Goethe's Concept of the Daemonic: After the Ancients (Rochester, NY: Camden House, 2006).
  • Reed, T.J., Goethe (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1984).
  • Richards, R.J., The Romantic Conception of Life: Science and Philosophy in the Age of Goethe (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 2002).
  • Schweitzer, A., Goethe: Four Studies, edited and translated by Charles R. Joy (Boston: Beacon Press, 1949).
  • Simmel, G., “Goethe und die Jugend,” in Der Tag 395 [6] (August, 1914), translated by Ulrich Teucher and Thomas M. Kemple in Theory, Culture, Society 24 (2007): 85-90.
  • Stephenson, R.H., Studies in Weimar Classicism: Writing as Symbolic Form (Oxford: Peter Lang, 2010).
  • Tantillo, A.O., The Will to Create: Goethe’s Philosophy of Nature (Pittsburgh: University of Pittsburgh Press, 2002).
  • Weier, W., Idee und Wirklichkeit: Philosophie deutscher Dichtung (Paderborn: Schöningh, 2005).

ii. Science and Methodology

  • Breidbach, O., Goethes Metamorphosenlehre (München: Fink, 2006).
  • Burwick, F., The Damnation of Newton: Goethe’s Color Theory and Romantic Perception (Berlin, Walter de Gruyter, 1986).
  • Ciamarra, L.P., Goethe e la storia: studi sulla "Geschichte der Farbenlehre" (Napoli: Liguori, 2001).
  • Holland, J., German Romanticism and Science: The Procreative Poetics of Goethe, Novalis, and Ritter (New York: Routledge, 2009).
  • Jardine, N., Scenes of Inquiry: On the Reality of Questions in the Sciences (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 2000).
  • Jürgen, T., Hoffnung und Gefahr (Frankfurt a.M.: Suhrkamp, 2001).
  • Krätz, O., Goethe und die Naturwissenschaften (München: Callwey, 1992).
  • Moiso, F., Goethe: La Natura e le sue Forme (Milano: Mimesis, 2002).
  • Nisbet, H.B., Goethe and the Scientific Tradition (London: Institute of Germanic Studies, 1972).
  • Nussbaumer, I., Zur Farbenlehre: Entdeckung der unordentlichen Spektren (Wien: Ed. Splitter, 2008).
  • Richards, R.J., The Tragic Sense of Life: Ernst Haeckel and the Struggle over Evolutionary Thought (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 2008).
  • Seamon, D., & Zajonic, A., Goethe’s Way of Science (Albany: SUNY Press, 1998).
  • Sepper, D.L., Goethe contra Newton: Polemics and the Project for a New Science of Color (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2007).
  • Sherrington, C., Goethe on Nature and Science (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1942).
  • Steigerwald, J., “Goethe’s Morphology: Ürphänomene and Aesthetic Appraisal,” Journal of the History of Biology 35 (2002): 291-328.
  • Stephenson, R.H., Goethe’s Conception of Knowledge and Science (Edinburgh: Edinburgh University Press, 1995).
  • Wells, G.A., Goethe and the Development of Science: 1750-1900 (Alphen aan den Rijn: Sijthoff & Noordhoff, 1978).

iii. Aesthetics, Politics, and Theology

  • Bell, M., The German Tradition of Psychology in Literature and Thought, 1700-1840 (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2009).
  • Dönike, M., Pathos, Ausdruck und Bewegung: zur Ästhetik des Weimarer Klassizismus 1796 – 1806 (Berlin: Walter de Gruyter, 2005).
  • Fröschle, H., Goethes Verhältnis zur Romantik (Würzburg: Königshausen & Neumann, 2002).
  • Hibbitt, R., Dilettantism and its Values: from Weimar Classicism to the fin de siècle
  • (London: Legenda, 2006).
  • Kuhn, B.H., Autobiography and Natural Science in the Age of Romanticism: Rousseau, Goethe, Thoreau (Farnham/Surrey: Ashgate, 2009).
  • Oergel, M., Culture and Identity: Historicity in German Literature and Thought 1770 – 1815 (Berlin: Walter de Gruyter, 2006).


Author Information

Anthony K. Jensen
City University of New York / Lehman College
U. S. A.

The Third Earl of Shaftesbury (1671—1713)

ShaftesburyAnthony Ashley Cooper, the Third Earl of Shaftesbury (1671-1713) was an English philosopher who profoundly influenced 18th century thought in Britain, France, and Germany.  As a part of an important social circle of English Freethinkers along with early deists such as John Toland, Matthew Tindal, and Anthony Collins, Shaftesbury’s work had a significant influence on French deists such as Voltaire and Rousseau.  He also corresponded with some of the most important thinkers of his day, including Locke, Leibniz, and Bayle.  Shaftesbury was most influential in the history of English language philosophy through his concept of the moral sense which heavily influenced Hutcheson, Butler, Hume, and Adam Smith; and Shaftesbury was influential in Germany through his concept of enthusiasm which recovered (intuitive) reason from mere (discursive) reasoning and influenced the Romantic idea of the creative imagination as found in German thinkers such as Lessing, Mendelssohn, Goethe, Herder, and Schiller.

Although Shaftesbury was enormously influential in the 18th century, his prestige declined in the 20th century, primarily due to the rise of analytic philosophy which defined philosophy such that Shaftesbury’s work seemed more like literature or rhetoric than proper philosophy. Those trained in analytic philosophy continue to have trouble reading Shaftesbury, largely because he self-consciously rejects systematic philosophy and focuses more on rhetoric and literary persuasion than providing numbered premises.  Shaftesbury is interested as much in moral formation as he is in moral theorizing, though his work does contain some, albeit intentionally veiled, discussion of theoretical concerns.

As Shaftesbury saw it, Hobbes had set the agenda of British moral philosophy (a search for the grounding of universal moral principles), and Locke had established its method (empiricism).  Shaftesbury’s important contribution was to focus that agenda by showing what a satisfactory response to Hobbes might look like but without giving up too much of Locke’s method.  Shaftesbury showed the British moralists that if we think of moral goodness as analogous to beauty, then (even within a broadly empiricist framework) it is still possible for moral goodness to be non-arbitrarily grounded in objective features of the world and for the moral agent to be attracted to virtue for its own sake, not merely out of self-interest.

In his most influential works, Shaftesbury thinks of moral judgment as self-reflection. First we have motives, and then we reflect on those motives resulting in a feeling of moral approval or condemnation. The process is the same when evaluating other agents:  we reflect on their motives and feel approval or condemnation.  In Shaftesbury’s aesthetic language, the state of having the morally correct motives is the state of being “morally beautiful,” and the state of approving the morally correct motives upon reflection is the state of having “good moral taste.” Shaftesbury argues that the morally correct motives which constitute moral beauty turn out to be those motives which are aimed at the good of one’s society as a whole.  This good is understood teleologically.  Furthermore Shaftesbury argues that both the ability to know the good of one’s society and the reflective approval of the motivation toward this good are innate capacities which must nevertheless be developed by proper socialization.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Works
  3. Aims and Methods
  4. Major Themes
    1. Moral Realism
    2. Moral Beauty
    3. Moral Sense
    4. Personal Identity
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Texts
    2. Secondary Texts

1. Life

Shaftesbury was part of an important political family.  Shaftesbury’s grandfather, the First Earl of Shaftesbury (1621-1683), was an influential and controversial Whig politician.  The Whigs were the party in favor of the supremacy of parliament over the monarchy in England.  The opposing party, the Tories, supported the monarchy and also tended to support a hierarchical state-sponsored religion, either Anglicanism or Roman Catholicism.  The Whigs favored freedom of religion, supporting religious “Dissenters,” at first Puritans, Calvinists, Quakers, etc., and later Deists.  In 1679 the First Earl of Shaftesbury introduced a bill into Parliament attempting to exclude King Charles II’s brother James (later King James II) from the throne because James was Roman Catholic.  The bill failed, and the First Earl was eventually charged with treason and fled to Holland where he died in exile.

Shaftesbury was very close to his grandfather and revered the memory of the First Earl.  Because Shaftesbury’s father had an unidentified degenerative illness, Shaftesbury was raised in the household of the First Earl from the age of four.  After the First Earl’s disgrace, Shaftesbury made it one of his life’s goals to rehabilitate his family’s reputation. Though his votes in Parliament occasionally sided with the Tories, Shaftesbury always stayed true to the political principles of his grandfather, consistently fighting for religious tolerance and a balance of powers at both the national and international level (see Voitle, p. 73; cf. p. 414).

John Locke (1632-1704) was a close friend of the First Earl and an advisor to the family for years to come after the First Earl’s death.  Locke was the personal physician and general advisor to the First Earl.  He supervised the childhood medical care of Shaftesbury’s father, the Second Earl (1652-1699). He also helped find a wife for the Second Earl and he cared for her during  her pregnancy  with the Third Earl.  Most significantly for our purposes, Locke supervised the Third Earl’s education.  He personally chose Shaftesbury’s governess Elizabeth Birch and designed a curriculum for her to follow in her instruction of the child.  This experience was, presumably, the basis for Locke’s later work Thoughts Concerning Education.  Under Birch’s tutelage, Shaftesbury received a strong education in the Classics and became fluent in Greek and Latin by the age of eleven.  Locke continued to check on Shaftesbury’s progress over the years.  After the First Earl’s death when Shaftesbury was twelve years old, he attended Winchester College, a secondary school which at the time was dominated by Tory sentiment. Shaftesbury felt persecuted by his peers on account of the First Earl’s political reputation.

In 1687, at the age of 16, Shaftesbury began his two-year “Grand Tour” of Europe, a customary part of a British nobleman’s education during the period.  After an extended stay in Paris, Shaftesbury spent most of his tour in Italy where, based on his diary, he focused his attention on art and architecture.  He was especially interested in ruins from the classical Roman period.  The first stop on his tour, however, was Holland where Shaftesbury spent several months visiting John Locke.

After returning from his Grand Tour in 1689, Shaftesbury took over managing much of the family estates and interests from his bedridden father.  Shaftesbury also had to supervise the education of his brothers and the marriages of his sisters; oversee the family finances and investments; govern the family lands, a job which included adjudicating disputes among the tenants; and, in 1695, take his place as a member of Parliament in the House of Commons.  Locke served as a primary advisor to the young Shaftesbury as he found his footing in these new duties, though Shaftesbury did not always follow Locke’s advice.  Shaftesbury had many philosophical conversations with Locke, some of which are preserved in correspondence. During this time, Shaftesbury wrote his first philosophical works, An Inquiry Concerning Virtue or Merit and the “Preface” to his edition of Whichcote’s sermons.

The smoky, polluted air of London did not agree with Shaftesbury, and he developed what would become a life-long and eventually fatal respiratory disease. Shaftesbury was diagnosed with a form of asthma, though Voitle suggests that the evidence points toward tuberculosis (Voitle, p. 226).  In 1698, due to his health, he retired from public life and spent a year in Holland where he met important thinkers of the day including Pierre Bayle (1647-1706), who became a close friend, despite their philosophical disagreements.

While in retirement he also began keeping his philosophical journal, which he labeled Askemata (Greek: exercises), posthumously published under the title of Philosophical Regimen.  The Askemata reveals Shaftesbury as a disciple of the ancient Stoics, especially Epictetus and Marcus Aurelius.

After the death of his father, Shaftesbury inherited the title of Earl and felt obligated to return to Parliament in 1700 (this time in the House of Lords).  Yet his health continued to worsen, and he gradually spent more and more time in retirement, during which time he prepared his philosophical works for publication.  By the time his collected works appeared in 1711 as Characteristics of Men, Manners, Opinions, Times, Shaftesbury’s health was so poor he decided to move to Italy in search of a more hospitable climate. There he continued to write. He prepared a revised second edition of the Characteristics, reading the work aloud to see how it sounded and making changes mostly in style and grammar.  He also added important illustrations, an allegorical headpiece for each treatise.  Finally, he began a sequel to the Characteristics to be titled Second Characters. The warm, sulphurous air off the Bay of Naples did help Shaftesbury’s health, but not enough.  He died in 1714 without finishing his work.

2. Works


Shaftesbury’s first publication was a collection of sermons written by Cambridge Platonist Benjamin Whichcote.  His introduction to that volume praised Whichcote for maintaining the goodness of human nature and the existence of a natural impulse toward benevolence. This was in contrast to most other 17th century divines who followed secular thinkers in holding that self-interest is the only motive to action and were therefore required to ground moral motivation in the rewards and punishments of the afterlife.

Shaftesbury’s major work Characteristics of Men, Manners, Opinions, Times (first edition published 1711) is an anthology of five previously published essays, sometimes with substantial revisions: An Inquiry Concerning Virtue or Merit (1699); A Letter Concerning Enthusiasm (1708); Sensus Communis, An Essay on the Freedom of Wit and Humor (1709); The Moralists, A Philosophical Rhapsody (1709); and Soliloquy, or Advice to an Author (1710). Along with these earlier works, Shaftesbury appended five new chapters of Miscellaneous Reflections roughly corresponding to the five essays which attempt to bring some coherence to the collection by commenting on and qualifying Shaftesbury’s earlier views.

His other published philosophical works include A Notion of the Historical Draught or Tablature of the Judgment Hercules and A Letter Concerning Design, originally a set of instructions for a painting Shaftesbury had commissioned and a letter commenting on those instructions, both written in 1712.  Shaftesbury planned to include these works in a projected sequel to the Characteristics called Second Characters, but he died before the project could be completed.  The Notion was subsequently included in the posthumous 1714 edition of the Characteristics, while the Letter Concerning Design was also added in the 1732 edition.  These two late works were included, along with some of Shaftesbury’s unfinished works (including a dialogue called The Picture of Cebes and a treatise to be entitled Plastics, an Epistolary Excursion in the Original Progress and Power of Designatory Art), in Benjamin Rand’s attempted reconstruction of Second Characters, published in 1914.

Finally, we have some of Shaftesbury’s correspondence and private journals (the Askemata), albeit in an unreliable transcription reordered and edited by Rand, published in 1900 under the title The Life, Unpublished Letters, and Philosophical Regimen of Anthony, Earl of Shaftesbury

3. Aims and Methods



Shaftesbury is primarily known in the history of philosophy for two things.  To moral philosophers he is known as the father of moral sense theory in British moralism; and to philosophers of art, he is known as “the first great aesthetician that England produced” (Cassirer 1953, 166) whose work was seminal for the German Romantics. But neither of these is what Shaftesbury himself thought was most important about his work.  Shaftesbury was not simply working out an epistemology of ethics or an account of aesthetic experience.  He did examine both of these issues, but his more direct interest was in transforming British moral inquiry by synthesizing ethics and aesthetics.

To use Shaftesbury’s own terms, the chief aim of his work is to introduce the concepts of “moral beauty” and “moral taste” to eighteenth  century British society.  In the final chapter of the Characteristics Shaftesbury sums up his overall project: “It has been the main scope and principal end of these volumes to assert the reality of a beauty and charm in moral as well as natural subjects, and to demonstrate the reasonableness of a proportionate taste and determinate choice in life and manners” (Miscellaneous Reflections V.iii, 466). Earlier he claims he is “intent chiefly on this single point, to discover how we may to best advantage form within ourselves what in the polite world is called a relish or good taste” (Miscellaneous Reflections III.i, 404).  Therefore Shaftesbury’s goal is to show that not every preference is equally appropriate to human nature and that there is such a thing as “good taste” in art and morality.

Shaftesbury’s writing style is intrinsically related to his philosophical goals.  Since Shaftesbury’s major audience was genteel or “polite” society, he often writes in a playfully oblique and ironic rhetorical style.  He uses elaborate analogies and metaphors to entertain and disarm his readers but not necessarily to carry any great philosophical weight (the most significant and easily misunderstood being the famous analogy of moral judgment with sensation). Therefore modern readers must always keep in mind the looseness and lack of analytic rigor with which Shaftesbury approaches his material.  He is trying to provide powerful suggestions aimed at forming his readers’ moral sentiments rather than to give detailed arguments to establish a theoretical system.  In other words, Shaftesbury wants to help his readers actually develop good moral taste, not merely to theorize about it.

4. Major Themes

a. Moral Realism

Shaftesbury did not see himself as inventing a new synthesis of aesthetics and ethics.  Rather, he thought he was protecting a classical synthesis.  And Shaftesbury thought the primary threat to the classical notions of moral beauty and moral taste came from the empiricist philosophy of Hobbes and Locke.

The four elements of Hobbes’s view to which Shaftesbury objected were empiricism, mechanism, voluntarism, and egoism.  Empiricism rejected innate ideas of morality.  Instead, moral principles were understood as a result of subjective emotions whereas classical moral philosophy saw moral principles as deriving from the human being’s objective teleology.  The modern mechanistic physics, however, rejected natural teleology.  If there was to be a set of universal moral principles, it could not be grounded on universal human nature, but it must be, as voluntarism asserts, grounded on a sovereign will (either God’s or the human government’s) expressed in positive law.

Shaftesbury believed Hobbes had reduced morality to self-interest, and it is to this Hobbesian “skepticism” that Shaftesbury is responding.  But Shaftesbury also had another, more personal target.  As a child Shaftesbury had been tutored by John Locke, a personal advisor of  his grandfather.  But as  Shaftesbury grew up, he came to reject the moral skepticism he thought followed from Locke’s empiricism and voluntaristic divine command theory. According to Shaftesbury, many of those who rejected Hobbes’s political philosophy, including the “free writers” (read: deists) and Locke, nevertheless went “in the self-same tract” as Hobbes’s philosophy.  Shaftesbury goes on to argue that Locke was in fact more dangerous than Hobbes or the Deists because, unlike them, Locke had the reputation of “sincerity as a most zealous ‘Christian’ and believer” and was thus able to make the nominalist position attractive to a wide audience.  And it was Locke who had succeeded in convincing many of the British moralists to give up the idea of goodness as natural rather than as socially constructed.

It was Mr. Locke that struck the home blow: for Mr. Hobbes’s character and base slavish principles in government took off the poison of his philosophy. ’Twas Mr. Locke that struck at all fundamentals, threw all order and virtue out of the world, and made the very ideas of these (which are the same as those of God) “unnatural,” and without foundation in our minds. (Rand 1900, p. 403)

Hence it was against Locke that Shaftesbury thought morality most needed to be defended.

What bothered Shaftesbury and many of his contemporaries about Hobbes and Locke were the empiricists’ apparent rejection of the “reality” of virtue. In his dialogue The Moralists, Shaftesbury has the character Philocles distinguish two ways modern religious philosophers defended the link between religion and morality: “Some of them hold zealously for virtue, and are realists in the point. Others, one may say, are only nominal moralists by making virtue nothing in itself, a creature of will only or a mere name of fashion” (The Moralists, II.2, p. 262, my emphasis).  Later in the dialogue, the character Theocles says that the author of “a certain fair Inquiry” (i.e., Shaftesbury’s own Inquiry Concerning Virtue and Merit) argued against a specifically religious basis for ethics:

For being, in respect of virtue, what you lately called a realist, he endeavours to show that it is really something in itself and in the nature of things, not arbitrary or factitious (if I may so speak), not constituted from without or dependent on custom, fancy or will, not even on the supreme will itself, which can no way govern it but, being necessarily good, is governed by it and ever uniform with it. (The Moralists, II.3, p. 266-7)

Here a “realist” about virtue is someone who holds the view that morality is “in the nature of things.”  On this scheme, then, moral realism is opposed not only to relativism (the view that morality is constituted by “custom”) and subjectivism (the view that morality is constituted by an individual’s “fancy”) but also to voluntarism (the view that morality is constituted by the “will” of a sovereign, whether Locke’s God or Hobbes’s Leviathan).  So, according to Shaftesbury, to give morality a subjective basis in individual self-interest (even if one then attempted to construct on this subjective basis a set of objective and universal moral laws), rather than an objective basis in some intrinsic feature of character or action, is to deny the reality of moral distinctions, a position synonymous in the early modern mind with moral skepticism. Conversely, to call morality “real” was to commit oneself to what Shaftesbury’s predecessor Ralph Cudworth called “eternal and immutable” principles of morality.

b. Moral Beauty


Throughout the Characteristics, Shaftesbury argues that moral beauty is a “beauty of the sentiments, the grace of actions, the turn of characters, and the proportions of a human mind” (Sensus Communis IV.ii, p. 62).  In general, for Shaftesbury, beauty is a matter of harmonious proportion or “numbers.” The “beauties of the human soul,” then, are “the harmony and numbers of an inward kind” (Sensus Communis IV.ii, p. 63).  They are an “inward anatomy” of soul which, like the outward anatomy of the body, must be brought into the “order or symmetry” that is constitutive of beauty and health (Inquiry 2.I.ii, p. 194).

For Shaftesbury, the concept of moral beauty is not merely a metaphorical comparison between ethics and aesthetics.  Rather beauty and goodness are “one and the same” (The Moralists III.ii, p. 320) such that moral or mental beauty turns out to be more fundamental than physical beauty.  Beauty, Shaftesbury argues, is primarily a property of souls or minds, not of bodies at all: “the beautifying not the beautified, is the really beautiful” (Moralists III.ii, p. 322).   When we judge a body to be beautiful we are really judging the act of designing and creating the body to be beautiful.  Shaftesbury argues for this conclusion by pointing out that when we say a statue is beautiful, we aren’t admiring the “matter” (the marble or bronze or whatever) but the “art and design” which Shaftesbury calls “the form or forming power.”

Yet terms like “design” and “form” can be either nouns or verbs.  That is, we can speak either of the form of an object or the act of forming the object.  Shaftesbury concludes, “Here therefore is double beauty. For here is both the form, the effect of mind, and mind itself.” (Moralists III.ii, p. 323)  He calls the passive objects “dead forms … which bear a fashion and are formed, whether by man or nature, but have no forming power, no action or intelligence,” and he calls the active subjects variously “living forms,” “forming forms,” or “the forms which form, that is, which have intelligence, action and operation.”

Thus Shaftesbury distinguishes two distinct “degrees or orders of beauty” before going on to argue for a third order of beauty “which forms not only such as we call mere forms but even the forms which form” (Moralists III.ii, p. 323-4). Hence we have these three orders of beauty:  first the dead forms, second the forming forms, and third the “supreme and sovereign beauty.” If the first order of beauty is the form of the object in the sense of the object’s design, then the second order of beauty is the active mental subject capable of creating this sort of intelligent design. In other words, the second order of beauty is the human mind itself which, through its intelligent creativity, imposes ordered design on the matter.  But, while the mind is a forming power which gives form to the body, at the same time the mind has its own form which is given to it by its participation in the divine Mind, “the principle, source, and fountain of all beauty” (Moralists III.ii, p. 324). Thus the three forms or orders of beauty seem to be natural beauty, moral beauty, and the beauty of God.

Following ancient Stoicism, Shaftesbury thinks of the world as a unified organism infused by the immanent living “soul” or “mind” of God without which even the natural world would be dead and hence could not be beautiful.  God (“the universal and sovereign Genius”) is a “uniting principle” which makes individual parts of nature into a system, a living organism directed to a teleological end (Moralists III.i, p. 301). Nature, then, is not simply a “mere body, a mass of modified matter,” but is a rationally structured “whole” which constitutes a “self” or mind whose body is the world (Moralists III.i, p. 302-3).

The teleological element of this view is emphasized when Shaftesbury describes his vision of an ever-widening system of interconnectedness.  Shaftesbury starts with the concept of an ordered system:  “Whatever things have order, the same have unity of design and concur in one, are parts constituent of one whole or are, in themselves, entire systems” (The Moralists II.iv, p. 274).  In other words, the concept of order is teleological: a system has order insofar as its parts are aimed at a single end.  Organisms and artifacts are examples of this sort of system: “Such is a tree with all its branches, an animal with all its members, and edifice with all its exterior and interior ornaments” (ibid.).  Just as the parts of a human artifact, such as a piece of architecture, are designed so as to form a unified whole, the parts of a plant or animal are also interconnected in such a way as to form a complete system.   Thus something forms a system if its parts are not “independent but all apparently united … according to one simple, consistent and uniform design” (ibid.).  For example, this sort of “mutual dependency of things” can be seen “in any dissected animal, plant or flower where [even] he who is no anatomist nor versed in natural history sees that the many parts have a relation to the whole, for thus much even a slight view affords” (The Moralists II.iv, p. 275).

But individual organisms are only relatively self-sufficient.  Their parts are internally united, but at the same time organisms are externally united to other organisms.  As Shaftesbury puts it in the Inquiry:

If therefore, in the structure of this or any other animal, there be anything which points beyond himself and by which he is plainly discovered to have relation to some other being or nature besides his own, then will this animal undoubtedly be esteemed a part of some other system. (Inquiry I.ii.2, p. 168).

So, for example, human organisms, especially as infants, are “helpless, weak, and infirm” and are thus inherently (“purposely, and not by accident”) “rational and sociable” such that humanity “can no otherwise increase or subsist than in that social intercourse and community which is his natural state” (The Moralists II.iv, p. 283). Likewise the human species is dependent on other species of plants and animals for their survival just as, for example, “to the existence of the spider that of the fly is absolutely necessary,” showing that each individual species is “in general, a part only of some other system,” namely “the system of all animals” (Inquiry I.ii.2, p. 168).

Thus human organisms form a system called a community.  Likewise, all human communities form the human species (“the system of his kind”), which fits into a certain ecosystem of the planet Earth, which has its ordered place in the universe as a whole.  Thus Shaftesbury concludes, “all things in this world are united” (The Moralists II.iv, p. 274).

For Shaftesbury, this cosmic order has moral implications.  If man is an ordered system of parts, then “there must be somewhere a last or ultimate end in man” (Regimen, p. 48).  Because human beings have instinctive “dispositions of mind such as plainly refer to a species and society, and to the enjoyment of converse, mutual alliance, and friendship, then is the end of man society” (Regimen, p. 48-9; cf. the similar argument at Inquiry II.i, p. 167).

The virtues (things such as “integrity, justice, faith” etc.) are those character traits which allow us to live in society with other humans thereby fulfilling our “end.”  Therefore the virtues are “part of a man, as he is a man” (Regimen, p. 50) – they allow us to be fully human and to “live according to nature” (Regimen p. 52).

In this way, the natural order grounds the normativity of individual moral beauty.  Following classical Platonic and Stoic sources Shaftesbury holds that everything else is beautiful to the degree that it works in harmony with the supreme beauty of providential design (The Moralists II.iii, p. 277).  Thus there is a “nature upon which the world depends, and … every genius else must be subordinate to that one good genius” (Moralists III.i, p. 300).

While the supreme beauty can serve as a standard to ground the particular choices of particular minds, it is not a subjectively chosen standard.  It is the objective ordering of the universe. For Shaftesbury beauty in general is a proper ordering between the parts of something according to the universal natural rules of harmony and proportion.  Therefore a viewer’s subjective failure to judge the proper objective value of this ordering does not diminish its value.  This value is a “symmetry and proportion founded still in nature” (Soliloquy III.iii, p. 157-8).  And when “we are reconciled to the goodly order of the universe” by developing beautiful souls “we harmonize with nature and live in friendship with God and man” (Moralists III.iii, p. 334). It is this harmonious relationship to the natural order that Shaftesbury calls moral beauty.

In summary, beauty, whether of a body or a soul, is grounded in an objective standard of order – namely the mind of God as expressed in the natural order.  At the highest level this order is the “supreme beauty” of God which guides God’s own creation of the natural order and which we in turn imitate when we bring order to our bodies, souls, or artworks.

c. Moral Sense


In his essay Sensus Communis, Shaftesbury argues for an understanding of “common sense” as a sense of the common good (Sensus Communis III.1-2, 48-53). Shaftesbury finds a predecessor in the Roman tradition which followed Marcus Aurelius’s coining of the term koinonoemosune to describe the same sort of sense of the common good (Sensus Communis III.1, 48n19).  This notion of the common good recalls the distinction between one’s “private good” and one’s “real good” which Shaftesbury draws in his essay An Inquiry Concerning Virtue or Merit. The private good or “self-interest” is the “end” or “interest” which is “right” for an individual of one’s species and toward which the natural affections point when they are not “ill.”  And the real good or “virtue” is the end in which one’s private good harmonizes with the common good of one’s species as a whole (Inquiry I.II.1, p. 167).  Note that pursuing one’s private good is not necessarily selfish.  In fact, for Shaftesbury, pursuing one’s private good is necessary, natural, and therefore good (insofar as it does not conflict with the public good).  “Selfishness” is not just any regard for one’s private good, but an “immoderate” one which is “inconsistent with the interest of the species or public” (Inquiry I.II.2, p. 170).

Shaftesbury emphasizes the importance of one’s relation to society when he says that a creature is “nowise” good (that is, neither “privately” nor “really” good) if it is naturally part of a “system” but is either detached from the system or harms that system (Inquiry I.II.1, p. 168).  Recall, as discussed above, that a human’s most immediate “system” is society. In this way the sensus communis becomes a necessary component in Shaftesbury’s ethics.  On Shaftesbury’s view, for any action to be considered good, the agent must be moved to action by an affection for the good of the system: one can only be “supposed good when the good or ill of the system to which he has relation is the immediate object of some passion or affection moving him” (Inquiry I.II.1, p. 169).  According to Shaftesbury, then, we could not have an affection toward the common good if we didn’t somehow represent the common good to ourselves.  And it is the sensus communis which allows us to do that. Shaftesbury is clear that it is not enough that our actions be in fact aimed at the common good though still inwardly motivated by self-interest: “as soon as he has come to have any affection towards what is morally good and can like or affect such good for its own sake, as good and amiable in itself, then is he in some degree good and virtuous, and not till then” (Inquiry I.iii.3, p. 188).  To be virtuous, an action must be aimed at the common good because we recognize that it is the common good and have an affection toward it as such.  Thus a truly virtuous and good creature is “one as by the natural temper or bent of his affections is carried primarily and immediately, and not secondarily and accidentally, to good and against ill” (Inquiry I.ii.2, 171).  Shaftesbury thinks this affection toward the good of one’s species is natural and common to every member of the species.  Thus a virtuous action “ought by right” to have as its “real motive” the natural affection for one’s species.

Being motivated by an affection toward the common good is, however, only a necessary, not a sufficient, condition for being virtuous. While anything can be good under Shaftesbury’s definition, only a human being can be virtuous.  This is because virtue requires a “reflected sense” (that is, the ability to reflect on what is good and right) which requires a high degree of reason.  Shaftesbury says:

But to proceed from what is esteemed mere goodness and lies within the reach and capacity of all sensible creatures, to that which is called virtue or merit and is allowed to man only: In a creature capable of forming general notions of things, not only the outward beings which offer themselves to the sense are the objects of affection, but the very actions themselves and the affections of pity, kindness, gratitude and their contraries, being brought into the mind by reflection, become objects. So that, by means of this reflected sense, there arises another kind of affection towards those very affections themselves, which have been already felt and have now become the subject of a new liking or dislike. (Inquiry I.ii.3, p. 172)

The view seems to be that the sensus communis shows us what is good for our species and we naturally “approve” of that good and have an “affection” towards it, thereby motivating us to act.  Those actions are individually good which are motivated by an affection toward the good of the whole. Then our “reflected sense” gives us a “new affection” towards the motives which result in good actions.   On the next page Shaftesbury refers to this “reflected sense” as a “sense of right and wrong” which he defines as “a sentiment or judgment of what is done through just, equal and good affection or the contrary” (Inquiry I.ii.3, p. 173).  The notion of the moral sentiments, as Shaftesbury employs it, presupposes the existence of the sensus communis.  A properly functioning person is already motivated by the right affections as represented by the sensus communis, and then our moral sentiment (our “sense of right and wrong”) confirms that those are in fact the right motivations by giving us a higher-order “feeling,” “affection,” or “sentiment” of which actions are done by the right affections. In other words, moral sentiment is a second-order affection toward the “right” first-order affections. Note that, while Shaftesbury also talks as if not only first-order affections but also actions, tempers, etc., can be the objects of the moral affection, it must be remembered that for Shaftesbury no action or temper is truly good or virtuous unless it is motivated by affection for the common good.  In sum, after the sensus communis determines the moral action and motivates us to pursue it as good, then moral sentiment approves of what the common sense tells us via a feeling of affection and thereby motivates us to pursue it as virtuous.

It is important to notice here that, while Shaftesbury refers to our moral sentiments as our “conscience” and even as our “sense of right and wrong,” he is not trying to establish a “moral sense” as a distinct mental “faculty” for receiving moral ideas.  As D.D. Raphael notes, “the casual application of the word ‘sense’ to the moral faculty is hardly more significant in Shaftesbury than it is in Samuel Clarke, who was a severe rationalist” (The Moral Sense, p. 16). We talk of a “sense of purpose,” a “sense of urgency,” a “sense of adventure,” a “sense of humor,” etc.   Sometimes we even speak of morally relevant “senses” such as a “sense of decency,” a “sense of shame,” a “sense of duty,” etc.  But we don’t mean to suggest that any of these “senses” ought to be thought of as analogous to the physical senses or that they are special mental faculties metaphysically distinct from our ordinary mental faculties.  Likewise, Shaftesbury’s use of the phrase “sense of right and wrong” is simply a figure of speech.  He thought we used our ordinary faculties of thinking, feeling, and desiring to make moral judgments.

Shaftesbury sometimes seems to suggest that moral judgment is instinctive, yet this is not his considered view. For example, in the dialogue titled The Moralists, A Philosophical Rhapsody, Shaftesbury seems to advance the claim that our sense of beauty is innate: “Nothing surely is more strongly imprinted on our minds or more closely interwoven with our souls than the idea or sense of order and proportion” (The Moralists II.4, p. 273-4).   In this context, Shaftesbury is specifically talking about natural beauty, but, as we have seen above, moral beauty is a function of one’s relationship to the natural order.  Shaftesbury notes that we can easily tell the difference between a structure created by an architect and a mere “heap of sand and stones” and claims that “this difference is immediately perceived by a plain internal sensation.”  The source of this sensation seems to be the common sense.  In the Sensus Communis essay, Shaftesbury argues that true beauty in art requires the artist to submit the “particulars” of the artwork “to the general design” and make “all things subservient to that which is principal” (Sensus Communis IV.3, p. 66), adding that “common sense (according to just philosophy) judges of those works which want the justness of a whole and show their author, however curious and exact in particulars, to be in the main a very bungler” (Sensus Communis IV.3, p. 67). Hence it is the common sense (or “sense of beauty” as he calls it in The Moralists) which discerns “order and proportion” so that taste can approve or disapprove of them.

Now, Shaftesbury seems to think this ability of common sense to detect beauty is innate.  When we perceive an object or action we immediately (“straight”) distinguish the beautiful from the ugly (The Moralists III.2, p. 326),  Similarly, he says in the Inquiry that the mind “cannot be without .. nor can it withhold” judgments of moral taste, and he compares the functioning of the moral faculty to the functioning of a bodily organ:  “this affection of a creature towards the good of the species or common nature is as proper and natural to him as it is to any organ, part or member of an animal body, or mere vegetable, to work in its known course and regular way of growth” (Inquiry II.I.1, 192). But these statements are misleading in isolation.

By this point in The Moralists, Shaftesbury has already observed that taste requires cultivation: “How long before a true taste is gained! How many things shocking, how many offensive at first, which afterwards are known and acknowledge the highest beauties! For it is not instantly we acquire the sense by which these beauties are discoverable” (The Moralists III. 2, p. 320).  Shaftesbury also says (following the Cambridge Platonists) that the affection for and knowledge of the good can be lost by vice: “contrary habit and custom (a second nature) is able to displace” even the most natural instincts (Inquiry I.III.1, 179).  Likewise in the Miscellaneous Reflections, Shaftesbury writes that “a legitimate and just taste can neither be begotten, made, conceived or produced without the antecedent labour and pains of criticism” (Miscellany III.2, p. 408).

If anything about the sensus communis or moral taste is innate, it is the potential to develop good taste.  Everyone is born with these faculties.  But everyone must be educated in how to use them.  Moral taste is a natural faculty but it is also a cultivated faculty.  Elsewhere Shafesbury argues that though “good rustics who have been bred remote from the formed societies of men” might have been “so happily formed by nature herself that, with the greatest simplicity or rudeness of education, they have still something of a natural grace and comliness in their action,” it is nevertheless “undeniable, however, that the perfection of grace and comliness of action and behavior can be found only among the people of a liberal education” since such perfection requires knowledge of “those particular rules of art which philosophy alone exhibits” (Soliloquy I.3 p. 85-7). So virtue must be cultivated like good taste in art or wine.  Only then can one act “from his nature, in a manner necessarily and without reflection” (Sensus Communis IV.1, p. 60).

In summary, our moral sense is a not a special instinctive faculty, but an innate potential to approve of certain actions that must be activated by good education in society. Once we have been trained in the art of sociable conversation, our moral sense will inevitably approve of those actions which are motivated by the teleological good of society as a whole.

d. Personal Identity


In his essay Soliloquy Shaftesbury describes moral reasoning through the mechanism of conscience as requiring the agent to partition herself into multiple voices (or “selves”) in order to engage in fruitful internal discussion on the model of a Socratic dialogue.  Soliloquy, he says, is a kind of “self-dissection” in which an individual “becomes two distinct persons” in order to “be his own subject” of advice and edification (Soliloquy I.i, p. 72).  He calls “this method of soliloquy” an “art” or “regimen” which is “practiced” by “all great wits,” especially by “the poet and philosopher” and even “the orator” (Soliloquy I.i, p. 73).

Here soliloquy means something like the examination of conscience.  The point of dividing oneself into two dialogue partners is to achieve the kind of consensus that results from rational discussion (Soliloquy I.ii, p. 77).  We reflect within ourselves and notice that we are of two minds about something (we “discover a certain duplicity of soul”).  Then we discuss the issue with ourselves until we bring the two views into dialectical agreement.  In this way we achieve integrity and self-unity within our mind (we “make us agree with ourselves and be of a piece within”).  In aesthetic terms, we are trying to bring our soul into harmony with itself.

For Shaftesbury, the purpose of soliloquy is not only self-creation, but also preparation for public discourse.  It is significant that the full title of the essay is Soliloquy, or Advice to an Author, an “author” being one who “publishes” (makes public) his “meditations” (private thoughts). Shaftesbury’s advice is that we test our thoughts by the method of soliloquy before we presume to share them: “so that, unless the party has been used to play the critic thoroughly upon himself, he will hardly be found proof against the criticisms of others” (Soliloquy I.i, p. 76).  What is significant here is that public edification is the assumed goal of philosophical thinking.

However, prior to public discourse, we must endeavor to construct a coherent self through the method of soliloquy.  “Our thoughts,” says Shaftesbury, “have generally such an obscure implicit language that it is the hardest thing in the world to make them speak out distinctly. For this reason, the right method is to give them voice and accent” (Soliloquy I.ii, p. 78).  By the method of giving voice to our thoughts here, Shaftesbury has in mind the “meditations, occasional reflections, solitary thoughts or other such exercises as come under the notion of this self-discoursing practice” (Soliloquy I.i, p. 74) that make up his own private notebooks which he labeled Askemata (exercises or “regimen”). In his Regimen Shaftesbury applies the practice of dialectical reasoning to his own inner life via the method of soliloquy.

For Shaftesbury, the result of achieving harmony of soul is the construction of a unified “self.”  “It is the known province of philosophy,” Shaftesbury writes, “to teach us ourselves, keep us the self-same person and to regulate our governing fancies, passions and humors as to make us comprehensible to ourselves” (Soliloquy III.i, p. 127).   With regard to the question of the self, Shaftesbury ridicules that “which stands for philosophy in some famous schools,” saying it cannot generate “manners or understanding” because “It pretends indeed some relation to manners as being definitive of the natures, essences and properties of spirits” (Soliloquy III.i, p. 128).   In other words, scholastic philosophy confuses an accidental property (a “relationship”) of the self with an essential one.  It does this by “defining ‘material’ and ‘immaterial substances’ and distinguishing their properties and modes” as if this were “the right manner of proceeding in the discovery of our own natures” (Soliloquy III.i, p. 129-130).  This focus on the metaphysics of “modes and substances” is, however, “beside the mark and reaches nothing we can truly call our interest or concern.”  It does not tell us who we really are (Soliloquy III.i, p. 130).  The scholastics make the same mistake as a person who attempts to understand the nature of a watch by asking “of what metal or what matter each part was composed” rather than “what the real use was of such an instrument or by what movements its end was best attained and its perfection acquired” (Soliloquy III.i, p. 131).  Likewise, the philosopher engaged in metaphysical speculation has “considered not the real operation or energy of his subject, nor contemplated the man as real man and as a human agent, but as a watch or common machine” (ibid).

Shaftesbury argues that true self-knowledge comes from the study of the passions. This is because I am my passions:  “These passions, according as they have the ascendancy in me and differ in proportion with one another, affect my character and make me different with respect to myself and others” (Soliloquy III.i, p. 132).  My character or self is a function of my passions, and that character is the real me, not the material (or immaterial) substance that my passions are made out of (or inhere in).  Were my “passions, affections, and opinions” to change radically enough, then I would become a different self, even if, contra Locke, I retained in my “memory the faint marks or tokens of former transactions” (Soliloquy III.i, p. 127).  This is because my passions are aimed at what I take to be my happiness (Soliloquy III.i, p 132).  And, as the teleological end of my life, my happiness is what makes me who I am.

True philosophy, then, is the kind of self-reflection which makes known to an agent what her passions are aimed at so that she can bring them into harmony with one another and thereby construct a coherent self.  Until I can understand my own passions (“ascertain my ideas”) and control them (“keep my opinion, liking and esteem of things the same” from moment to moment), I will remain “the same mystery to myself as ever” (Soliloquy III.i, p. 134), regardless of the truth of my metaphysical arguments.

The problem of an incoherent self arises primarily, in Shaftesbury’s view, when we define our lives in pursuit of pleasure.  Pleasure is not stable, since pleasure comes from a variety of sources and the pursuit of pleasure demands a constant search for new sources, for “when we follow pleasure merely, we are disgusted and change from one sort to another, condemning that at one time which at another we earnestly approve, and never judging equally of happiness while we follow passion and mere humor” (Soliloquy III.ii, p. 138).  What we need is a “rule of good” which can “control my fancy and fix it, if possible, on something which may hold good” (ibid).  This is what Shaftesbury finds in the “honest pleasure” of moral beauty, the honestum which is both attractive and right.

Only the “pleasure of society” is “constant” enough to ground a coherent self, enabling me to “bring my other pleasures to correspond and be friends with it” (Soliloquy III.ii, p. 139).  Thus, “when I employ my affection in friendly and social actions, I find I can sincerely enjoy myself” without risking the kind of self-dissolution which comes from pursuit of self-interested pleasures (Soliloquy III.ii, p. 138).  Shaftesbury argues the pleasure I receive from moral affection is derived via sympathy (“by communication, a receiving it, as it were, by reflection”) from your enjoyment of my actions (Inquiry II.ii.1, p. 204).  In the Inquiry Shaftesbury argues that human beings have natural affections for the good of society, and we cannot flourish as human beings unless we live in society and develop the virtues which allow us to live according to our nature.  Thus we are not fully human if we are cut off from a sympathetic relationship with a community. What Shaftesbury adds in Soliloquy is to draw out the implication that we can only construct a self-identity on the basis of sympathetic pleasure.  In this way we construct our identities out of our social interactions with others.

Thus Shaftesbury’s account of self-construction is essentially intersubjective and dialectical.  It involves at least soliloquy if not actual interpersonal dialogue.  Since it is often difficult to know what our true passions and opinions are, we need talk therapy (a “vocal looking-glass”) in the form of dialogue or soliloquy: “Our thoughts have generally such an obscure implicit language that it is the hardest thing in the world to make them speak out distinctly. For this reason, the right method is to give them voice and accent” (Soliloquy I.ii, p. 78).

Shaftesbury’s own dialogue The Moralists seems to be an example of this process since both characters in the dialogue present Shaftesburian viewpoints and help each other come to the truth (see Prince, p. 69). Indeed the assembled text of the Characteristics itself expresses this view through its literary structure.   The Moralists is explicitly a dialogue.  The treatise Soliloquy, or Advice to an Author, as its title implies, is an internal dialogue in which Shaftesbury is addressing himself.  The Miscellaneous Reflections on the Preceding Treatises and Other Critical Subjects, Shaftesbury’s self-commentary, written in the third-person, are in effect an extended soliloquy that can be read as a dialogue between Shaftesbury the literary critic and Shaftesbury the philosopher.  In this light we can see that even the (seemingly) ordinary philosophical treatise An Inquiry Concerning Virtue or Merit takes on a dialogical character.  Not only does the author of the Inquiry show up as a character in The Moralists (see II.3, p. 265), the Inquiry itself, when read in the overall context of the other more obviously dialogical works of the Characteristics and thus located amidst a series of overheard conversations, begins to read like an overheard scholastic-style philosophy lecture.

None of the individual treatises of the Characteristics is written unambiguously in Shaftesbury’s own voice. The character of “Shaftesbury,” the author of Characteristics of Men, Manners, Opinions, Times, emerges only as the harmonious unity of the other voices. In this way, the structure of Shaftesbury’s work as a whole is an embodiment of intersubjective reasoning.  The truth of Shaftesbury’s philosophy is the product of a (metaphorical) community of persons reasoning together through (simulated) interpersonal dialogue.  He is trying to achieve what he says Plato achieved in his Socratic dialogues: “they exhibited [real characters and manners] alive and set the countenances and complexions of men plainly in view. And by this means they not only taught us to know others, but, what was principal and of highest virtue in them, they taught us to know ourselves” (Soliloquy I.iii, p. 87).

5. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Texts

  • Shaftesbury, Anthony Ashley Cooper, Third Earl of. Characteristics of Men, Manners, Opinions, Times, ed. Lawrence E. Klein (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1999) [Cited by treatise title, part, section, and page number.]
  • Shaftesbury, Anthony Ashley Cooper, Third Earl of. The Life, Unpublished Letters, and Philosophical Regimen of Anthony, Earl of Shaftesbury, ed. Benjamin Rand (Macmillan, 1900)
  • Shaftesbury, Anthony Ashley Cooper, Third Earl of. Second Characters or the Language of Forms, ed. Benjamin Rand (Cambridge University Press, 1914)

b. Secondary Texts

  • Secondary Texts
  • Aldridge, A.O. “Shaftesbury and the Deist Manifesto” Transactions of the American Philosophical Society, new series 41:2 (June, 1951)
  • Bernstein, John Andrew. Shaftesbury, Rousseau and Kant: An Introduction to the Conflict between Aesthetic and Moral Values in Modern Thought (Rutherford: Fairlegh Dickinson, 1980)
  • Cassirer, Ernst. The Platonic Renaissance in England, trans. James P. Pettegrove. (Austin: University of Texas Press, 1953)
  • Darwall, Stephen. The British Moralists and the Internal ‘Ought’ (Cambridge University Press, 1995)
  • Den Uyl, Douglas J. “Shaftesbury and the Modern Problem of Virtue” Social Philosophy and Policy 15:1 (Winter 1998)
  • Gill, Michael. The British Moralists on Human Nature and the Birth of Secular Ethics (Cambridge, 2006)
  • Grean, Stanley. Shaftesbury’s Philosophy of Religion and Ethics (Ohio University Press, 1967)
  • Klein, Lawrence E. Shaftesbury and the Culture of Politeness: Moral Discourse and Cultural Politics in Early Eighteenth-Century England (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1994)
  • Lawrence E. Klein, ‘Cooper, Anthony Ashley, third earl of Shaftesbury (1671–1713)’, Oxford Dictionary of National Biography, Oxford University Press, 2004; online edn, Jan 2008,
  • Prince, Michael. Philosophical Dialogue in the British Enlightenment (Cambridge, 1996)
  • Raphael, D.D. The Moral Sense (Oxford University Press, 1947)
  • Rivers, Isabel. Reason, Grace, and Sentiment: A Study of the Language of Religion and Ethics in England, 1660-1780, Vol. II: Shaftesbury to Hume. (Cambridge University Press, 2000)
  • Schneewind, J.B. The Invention of Autonomy (Cambridge, 1998)
  • Voitle, Robert. The Third Earl of Shaftesbury, 1671-1713 (Louisiana State University Press, 1984)
  • Winkler, Kenneth P. “‘All is Revolution in Us’: Personal Identity in Shaftesbury and Hume” Hume Studies 26:1 (April, 2000)

Author Information

John McAteer
Houston Baptist University
U. S. A.

Aquinas: Metaphysics

aquinasMetaphysics is taken by Thomas Aquinas to be the study of being qua being, that is, a study of the most fundamental aspects of being that constitute a being and without which it could not be. Aquinas’s metaphysical thought follows a modified but general Aristotelian view. Primarily, for Aquinas, a thing cannot be unless it possesses an act of being, and the thing that possesses an act of being is thereby rendered an essence/existence composite. If an essence has an act of being, the act of being is limited by that essence whose act it is. The essence in itself is the definition of a thing; and the paradigm instances of essence/existence composites are material substances (though not all substances are material for Aquinas; for example, God is not). A material substance (say, a cat or a tree) is a composite of matter and form, and it is this composite of matter and form that is primarily said to exist. In other words, the matter/form composite is predicated neither of, nor in, anything else and is the primary referent of being; all other things are said of it. The details of this very rich metaphysical landscape are described below.

Table of Contents

  1. The Nature of Metaphysics
  2. Essence and Existence
  3. Participation
  4. Substance and Accident
  5. Matter and Form
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. General Studies

1. The Nature of Metaphysics

Saint Thomas, that is, Aquinas, clarifies the nature of metaphysics through ascertaining its particular subject-matter, its field of investigation. In order to ascertain the subject-matter of any particular science, Thomas distinguishes between the different intellectual operations that we use when engaged in some particular scientific endeavor. Broadly speaking, these fall into two categories: the speculative and the practical. Concerning some sciences, the intellect is merely speculative  by contemplating the truth of some particular subject-matter; while concerning other sciences, the intellect is practical, by  ascertaining the truth and seeking to apply. There are thus correspondingly two distinct classes of science: speculative science and practical science. Speculative sciences are those that contemplate truth whereas practical sciences are those that apply truth for some practical purpose. The sciences are then further distinguished through differentiating their various subject-matters.

Insofar as the speculative sciences merely contemplate truth but do not apply it for some practical purpose, the subject-matter of the speculative sciences is that which can be understood to some extent. Working within the Aristotelian tradition, Thomas holds that something is understood when it is separated from matter and is necessary to thing in some respect. For instance, when we understand the nature of a tree, what we understand is not primarily the matter that goes to constitute the tree in question, but what it is to be a tree, or the structuring principle of the matter that so organizes it and specifies it as a tree rather than a plant. Furthermore, assuming our understanding is correct, when we understand a thing to be a tree, we do not understand it to be a dog, or a horse, or a cat. Thus, in our understanding of a tree, we understand that which is necessary for the tree to be a tree, and not of anything that is not a tree. Hence, our understanding of a thing is separated from its matter and is necessary to it in some respect. Now, what is in motion is not necessary, since what is in motion can change. Thus, the degree to which we have understood something is conditional upon the degree to which it is separated from matter and motion. It follows then that speculative objects, the subject-matter of the speculative-sciences, insofar as they are what are understood, will be separated from matter and motion to some degree. Any distinctions that obtain amongst speculative objects will in turn signify distinctions amongst the sciences that consider those objects; and we can find distinctions amongst speculative objects based upon their disposition towards matter and motion.

There are three divisions that can apply to speculative objects, thereby permitting us to differentiate the sciences that consider such objects: (i) there is a class of speculative objects that are dependent on matter and motion both for their being and for their being understood, for instance, human beings cannot be without matter, and they cannot be understood without their constituent matter (flesh and bones); (ii) there is a class of speculative objects that depend on matter and motion for their being, but not for their being understood, for instance, we can understand lines, numbers, and points without thereby understanding the matter in which they are found, yet such things cannot be without matter; (iii) there is a class of speculative objects that depend on matter and motion neither for their being nor for their being understood.

Given these three classes of speculative objects, the speculative sciences that consider them can be enumerated accordingly: (i) physical science considers those things that depend on matter and motion both for their being and for their being understood; (ii) mathematics considers those things that depend on matter and motion for their being but not for their being understood; (iii) metaphysics or theology deals with those things that depend on matter and motion neither for their being nor for their being understood. Before going on to consider the subject-matter of metaphysics in a little more detail, it is important to point out that Thomas takes this division of the speculative sciences as exhaustive. For Thomas, there could be no fourth speculative science; the reason for this is that the subject-matter of such a science would have to be those things that depend on matter and motion for their being understood but not for their being, for all other combinations have been exhausted. Now, if a thing depends on matter and motion for its being understood but not for its being, then matter and motion would be put into its definition, which defines a thing as it exists. But if a thing’s existence is so defined as to include matter and motion, then it follows that it depends on matter and motion for its being; for it cannot be understood to be without matter and motion. Hence, all things that include matter and motion in their definitions are dependent on matter and motion for their being, but not all things that depend on matter and motion for their being depend on matter and motion for their being understood. There could be no fourth speculative science since there is no fourth class of speculative objects depending on matter and motion for their being understood but not for their being. Thomas thus sees this threefold division of the speculative sciences as an exhaustive one.

The third class of speculative objects comprises the objects of metaphysics or theology. Now Thomas does not equate these two disciplines, but goes on to distinguish between the proper subject-matter of metaphysics and the proper subject-matter of theology. Recall that this third class of speculative objects comprises those things depending on matter and motion neither for their being nor for their being understood. Such things are thus immaterial things; however, Thomas here draws a distinction. There are things that are immaterial insofar as they are in themselves complete immaterial substances; God and the angels would be examples of such things. To give the latter a title, let them be called positively immaterial. On the other hand there are things that are immaterial insofar as they simply do not depend on matter and motion, but can nevertheless be sometimes said to be found therein. In other words, things of the latter category are neutral with respect to being found in matter and motion, and hence they are neutrally immaterial. St Thomas’s examples of the latter are: being, substance, potency, form, act, one and many; such things can apply equally to material things (such as humans, dogs, cats, mice) and, to some extent, to positively immaterial things. Thus, the neutrally immaterial seem to signify certain aspects or modes of being that can apply equally to material and to immaterial things. The question then arises: what is the proper subject-matter of metaphysics: the positively immaterial or the neutrally immaterial?

According to Thomas, unaided human reason cannot have direct knowledge of the positively immaterial; this is because such things (God and angels) outstrip the human intellect’s capacity to know. Nevertheless, direct knowledge of the positively immaterial is possible, but this will not be on the basis of unaided human reason; it will require that the positively immaterial reveal themselves to us in some way, in which case direct knowledge of the positively immaterial will be dependent on some sort of revelation. As it is a purely rational science, not dependent on or presupposing the truths of revelation, metaphysics will be a study of the neutrally immaterial aspects of things, that is, a study of those modes of being that apply to all beings, whether they are material or immaterial. Such a study will be in accord with the Aristotelian conception of metaphysics as a study of being qua being, insofar as the neutrally immaterial apply to all beings and are not restricted to a certain class of beings. However, Thomas does not adopt the Aristotelian phrase (being qua being) as the subject-matter of metaphysics, he offers his own term. According to Thomas, ens commune (common being) is the proper subject-matter of metaphysics. Through an investigation of ens commune, an investigation into the aspects of being common to all beings, the metaphysician may indeed come to a knowledge of the causes of being and might thereby be led to the affirmation of divine being, but this is only at the end of the metaphysical inquiry, not at the beginning. Thus, metaphysics for Aquinas is a study of ens commune where this is understood as the common aspects of being without which a thing could not be; it does not presuppose the existence of divine being, and may not even be led to an affirmation of divine being (though Thomas of course offers several highly complex metaphysical arguments for the existence of divine being, but this should not be taken to be essential to the starting point of Thomistic metaphysics).

Metaphysics then is a study of the certain aspects common to all beings; and it is the task of the metaphysician to uncover the aspects of being that are indeed common and without which a thing could not be. There are certain aspects of being that are common insofar as they are generally applicable to all beings, and these are essence and existence; all beings exist and have an essence, hence metaphysics will be primarily concerned with the nature of essence and existence and their relationship to each other. Having completed an investigation into essence and existence, the metaphysician must investigate the aspects of being that are common to particular instances of being; and this will be a study of (i) the composition of substance and accident, and (ii) the composition of matter and form. The format of Thomistic metaphysics then takes a somewhat dyadic structure of descending generality: (i) essence and existence, (ii) substance and accident, (iii) matter and form. The format of the remainder of this article will be an investigation into these dyadic structures.

2. Essence and Existence


A general notion of essence is the following: essence is the definable nature of the thing that exists. Quite generally then, the essence of a thing is signified by its definition. The immediate question then is how the essence of a thing relates to its existence. In finite entities, essence is that which has existence, but it is not existence; this is a crude articulation of Thomas’s most fundamental metaphysical teaching: that essence and existence are distinct in finite entities. A consideration then of essence and existence in Thomas’s metaphysical thought will thus be a consideration of his fundamental teaching that essence and existence are distinct.

The most famous, and to a certain degree the most controversial, instance wherein Thomas argues for a distinction between a thing’s essence and its existence is in De Ente et Essentia [On Being and Essence] Chapter Four. The context is a discussion of immaterial substances and whether or not they are composed of matter. In that passage, Thomas is concerned with a popular medieval discussion known as universal hylemorphism. St Bonaventure, Thomas’s contemporary, had held that insofar as creatures are in potency in some respect, they must be material in some respect, since on the Aristotelian account, matter is the principle of potency in a thing. Thus, creatures, even immaterial creatures, must be material in some respect, even if this materiality is nothing like our corporeal materiality. Thomas takes up this issue in De Ente Chapter 4, pointing out that the Jewish thinker Avicebron seems to have been the author of this position.

Thomas takes the notion of universal hylemorphism to be absurd. Not only does it conflict with the common sayings of the philosophers, but also it is precisely as separated from matter and all material conditions that we deem separate (immaterial) substances separate, in which case they cannot be composed of matter. But if such substances cannot be composed of matter, what accounts for their potentiality? Such substances are not God, they are not pure act, they are in potentiality in some respect. So, if they are not material, then how are they in potency? Thomas is thus led to hold that they have an element of potentiality, but this is not the potency supplied by matter; rather, immaterial substances are composed of essence and existence, and it is the essence of the thing, standing in potency to a distinct act of existence, that accounts for the potentiality of creatures and thereby distinguishes them from God, who is not so composed. Thomas’s argumentation for the distinction between essence and existence unfolds on three stages and for each stage there has been at least one commentator who has held that Thomas both intended and established the real distinction therein.

In the first stage Thomas argues as follows. Whatever does not enter into the understanding of any essence is composed with that essence from without; for we cannot understand an essence without understanding the parts of that essence. But we can understand the essence of something without knowing anything about its existence; for instance, one can understand the essence of a man or a phoenix without thereby understanding the existence of either. Hence, essence and existence are distinct.

This little paragraph has generated considerable controversy, insofar as it is unclear what sort of distinction Thomas intends to establish at this stage. Is it merely a logical distinction whereby it is one thing to understand the essence of a thing and another to understand its existence? On this account, essence and existence could well be identical in the thing yet distinct in our understanding thereof (just as ‘Morning star’ and ‘Evening star’ are distinct in our conceptual expressions of the planet Venus, yet both are identical with Venus). On the other hand, does Thomas attempt to establish a real distinction whereby essence and existence are not only distinct in our understanding, but also in the thing itself? Commentators who hold that this stage only establishes a logical distinction focus on the fact that Thomas is here concerned only with our understanding of essence and not with actual (real) things; such commentators include Joseph Owens and John Wippel. Commentators who hold that this stage establishes a real distinction focus on the distinction between the act of understanding a thing’s essence and the act of knowing its existence, and they argue that a distinction in cognitional acts points to a distinction in reality; such commentators include Walter Patt, Anthony Kenny, and Steven Long.

In the second stage of argumentation, Thomas claims that if there were a being whose essence is its existence, there could only be one such being, in all else essence and existence would differ. This is clear when we consider how things can be multiplied. A thing can be multiplied in one of three ways: (i) as a genus is multiplied into its species through the addition of some difference, for instance the genus ‘animal’ is multiplied into the species ‘human’ through the addition of ‘rational’; (ii) as a species is multiplied into its individuals through being composed with matter, for instance the species ‘human’ is multiplied into various humans through being received in diverse clumps of matter; (iii) as a thing is absolute and shared in by many particular things, for instance if there were some absolute fire from which all other fires were derived. Thomas claims that a being whose essence is its existence could not be multiplied in either of the first two ways (he does not consider the third way, presumably because in that case the thing that is received or participated in is not itself multiplied; the individuals are multiplied and they simply share in some single absolute reality). A being whose essence is its existence could not be multiplied (i) through the addition of some difference, for then its essence would not be its existence but its existence plus some difference, nor could it be multiplied (ii) through being received in matter, for then it would not be subsistent, but it must be subsistent if it exists in virtue of what it is. Overall then, if there were a being whose essence is its existence, it would be unique, there could only be one such being, in all else essence and existence are distinct.

Notice that Thomas has once again concluded that essence and existence are distinct. John Wippel takes this to be the decisive stage in establishing that essence and existence are really distinct. He argues that insofar as it is impossible for there to be more than one being whose essence is its existence, there could not be in reality many such beings, in which case if we grant that there are multiple beings in reality, such beings are composed of essence and existence. On the other hand, Joseph Owens has charged Wippel with an ontological move and claims that Wippel is arguing from some positive conceptual content, to the actuality of that content in reality. Owens argues that we cannot establish the real distinction until we have established that there is something whose essence is its existence. Given the existence of a being whose essence is its existence, we can contrast its existence with the existence of finite things, and conclude that the latter are composites of essence and existence; and so Owens sees the real distinction as established at stage three of Thomas’s argumentation: the proof that there actually is a being whose essence is its existence.

Thomas begins stage three with the premise that whatever belongs to a thing belongs to it either through its intrinsic principles,  its essence, or from some extrinsic principle. A thing cannot be the cause of its own existence, for then it would have to precede itself in existence, which is absurd. Everything then whose essence is distinct from its existence must be caused to be by another. Now, what is caused to be by another is led back to what exists in itself (per se). There must be a cause then for the existence of things, and this because it is pure existence (esse tantum); otherwise an infinite regress of causes would ensue.

It is here that Owens believes that Thomas establishes the real distinction; since Thomas establishes (to his own satisfaction) that there exists a being whose essence is its existence. Consequently, we can contrast the existence of such a being with the existence of finite entities and observe that in the latter existence is received as from an efficient cause whereas in the former it is not. Thus, essence and existence are really distinct. However, it is important to note that on this interpretation, the real distinction could not enter into the argument for the existence of a being whose essence is its existence; for, on Owens’s account, such argumentation is taken to establish the real distinction. If it can be shown then that Thomas’s argumentation for the existence of a being whose essence is its existence does presuppose the real distinction, then Owens’s views as to the stage at which the real distinction is established would be considerably undermined.

Having established (at some stage) that essence and existence are distinct and that there exists a being whose essence is its existence, Thomas goes on to conclude that in immaterial substances, essence is related to existence as potency to act. The latter follows insofar as what receives existence stands in potency to the existence that it receives. But all things receive existence from the being whose essence is its existence, in which case the existence that any one finite thing possesses is an act of existence that actuates a corresponding potency: the essence. Thomas has thus shown that immaterial substances do indeed have an element of potency, but this need not be a material potency.

Notice that here Thomas correlates essence and existence as potency and act only after he has concluded to the existence of a being whose essence is its existence (God). One wonders then whether or not essence and existence can be related as potency and act only on the presupposition of the existence of God. Regardless of his preferred method in the De Ente Chapter 4, Thomas could very well have focussed on the efficiently caused character of existence in finite entities (as he does in the opening lines of the argument for the existence of God), and argued that insofar as existence is efficiently caused (whether or not this is from God), existence stands to that in which it inheres as act to potency, in which case the essence that possesses existence stands in potency to that act of existence. Therefore, Thomas need not presuppose the existence of God in order to hold that essence and existence are related as potency and act; all he need presuppose is (i) that essence and existence are distinct and (ii) that existence is efficiently caused in the essence/existence composite.

3. Participation


Essence/existence composites merely have existence; whatever an essence/existence composite is, it is not its existence. Insofar as essence/existence composites merely have, but are not, existence, they participate in existence in order to exist. This is a second of Thomas’s fundamental metaphysical teachings: whatever does not essentially exist, merely participates in existence. Insofar as no essence/existence composite essentially exists, all essence/existence composites merely participate in existence. More specifically, the act of existence that each and every essence/existence composite possesses is participated in by the essence that exists.

As a definition of participation, Thomas claims that to participate is to take a part (in) (partem capere) something. Following this definition, Thomas goes on to explain how one thing can be said to take a part in and thereby participate in another; this can happen in three ways.

Firstly, when something receives in a particular fashion what pertains universally to another, it is said to participate in that other; for example, a species (‘man’) is said to participate in its genus (‘animal’) and an individual (Socrates) is said to participate in its species (‘man’) because they (the species and the individual) do not possess the intelligible structure of that in which they participate according to its full universality.

Secondly, a subject is said to participate in the accidents that it has (for instance, a man is a certain colour, and thereby participates in the colour of which he is), and matter is said to participate in the formal structure that it has (for instance, the matter of a statue participates in the shape of that statue in order to be the statue in question).

Thirdly, an effect can be said to participate in its cause, especially when the effect is not equal to the power of that cause. The effect particularises and determines the scope of the cause; for the effect acts as the determinate recipient of the power of the cause. The effect receives from its cause only that which is necessary for the production of the effect. It is in this way that a cause is participated in by its effect.

In all of the foregoing modes of participation, to participate is to limit that which is participated in some respect. This follows from the original etymological definition of participation, that to participate is to take a part (in); for if to participate is merely to take a part in something, the participant will not possess the nature of the thing in which it participates in any total fashion, but only in partial fashion. What then can we conclude about the participation framework that governs essence and existence?

Essences exist, but they do not exist essentially, they participate in their acts of existence. Insofar as an essence participates in its act of existence, the essence limits that act of existence to the nature of the essence whose act it is; for the essence merely has existence, it is not existence, in which case its possession of existence will be in accord with the nature of the essence. The act of existence is thus limited and thereby individuated to the essence whose act it is. As a concrete application of this, consider the following. George Bush’s existence is not Tony Blair’s existence; when George Bush came into existence, Tony Blair did not come into existence, and when George Bush ceases to exist, Tony Blair will, in all likelihood, not cease to exist. George Bush’s existence is not indexed to the existence of Tony Blair, in which case the existence of either George Bush or Tony Blair is not identical to the other. The act of existence then is individuated to the essence whose act it is, and this because the essence merely participates in, and thereby limits, the act of existence that it possesses.

4. Substance and Accident


The next fundamental metaphysical category is that of substance. According to Aquinas, substances are what are primarily said to exist, and so substances are what have existence but yet are not identical with existence. Aquinas’s ontology then is comprised primarily of substances, and all change is either a change of one substance into another substance, or a modification of an already existing substance. Given that essence is that which is said to possess existence, but is not identical to existence, substances are essence/existence composites; their existence is not guaranteed by what they are. They simply have existence as limited by their essence.

Let us begin with a logical definition of substance, as this will give us an indication of its metaphysical nature. Logically speaking, a substance is what is predicated neither of nor in anything else. This captures the fundamental notion that substances are basic, and everything else is predicated either of or in them. Now, if we transpose this logical definition of substance to the realm of metaphysics, where existence is taken into consideration, we can say that a substance is that whose nature it is to exist not in some subject or as a part of anything else, but what exists in itself. Thus, a substance is a properly basic entity, existing per se (though of course depending on an external cause for its existence), and the paradigm instances of which are the medium sized objects that we see around us: horses, cats, trees and humans.

On the other hand there are accidents. Accidents are what accrue to substances and modify substances in some way. Logically speaking, accidents are predicated of or in some substance; metaphysically speaking, accidents cannot exist in themselves but only as part of some substance. As their name suggests, accidents are incidental to the thing, and they can come and go without the thing losing its identity; whereas a thing cannot cease to be the substance that it is without losing its identity.

Accidents only exist as part of some substance. It follows then that we cannot have un-exemplified properties as if they were substances in themselves. Properties are always exemplified by some substance, whereas substance itself is un-exemplifiable. For example, brown is always predicated of something, we say that x is brown, in which case brown is an accident. However, brown is never found to be in itself, it is always exemplified by something of which it is said.

Within Aquinas’s metaphysical framework, substances can be both material (cats, dogs, humans) and immaterial (angels), but as noted above, the paradigm instances of substances are material substances, and the latter are composites of matter and form; a material substance is neither its matter alone nor its form alone, since matter and form are always said to be of some individual and never in themselves. It follows then that material substances have parts, and the immediate question arises as to whether or not the parts of substances are themselves substances. In order to address this issue, we must ask two questions: (i) while they are parts of a substance, are such parts themselves substances? and (ii) are the parts of a substance themselves things that can exist without the substance of which they are parts?

Concerning (i) we must say that whilst they are parts of a substance such parts cannot be substances; this is so given the definition of substance outlined above: that whose nature it is to exist not in some subject. Given that the parts of a substance are in fact parts of a substance, it is their nature to exist in some subject  of which they are a part. Consequently, the parts of a substance cannot themselves be substances.

Concerning (ii) the case is somewhat different, now we must consider whether or not the parts of a substance can exist without the substance of which they are parts, that is, after the dissolution of the substance of which they are parts do the parts become substances in themselves? The parts of a substance receive their identity through being the parts of the substance whose parts they are. Thus, the flesh and bone of a human are flesh and bone precisely because they are parts of a human. When the human dies, the flesh and bone are no longer flesh and bone (except equivocally speaking) because they are no longer parts of a human substance; rather, the flesh and bone cease to function as flesh and bone and begin to decompose, in which case they are not themselves substances. However, on Aquinas’s view, the elements out of which a substance is made can indeed subsist beyond the dissolution of the substance. Thus, whilst the elements are parts of the substance, they are not, as parts of a substance, substances in themselves, but when the substance dissolves, the elements will remain as independent substances in their own right. Thus, in the case of the dissolution of the human being, whilst the flesh and bone no longer remain but decompose, the elements that played a role in the formation of the substance remain. In more contemporary terms we could say that before they go to make up the bodily substances we see in the world, atoms are substances in themselves, but when united in a certain form they go to make cats, dogs, humans, and cease to be independent substances in themselves. When the cat or dog or human perishes, its flesh and bones perish with it, but its atoms regain their substantial nature and they remain as substances in themselves. So, a substance can have its parts, and for as long as those parts are parts of a substance, those parts are not substances in themselves, but when the substance decomposes, those parts can be considered as substances in themselves so long as they are capable of subsisting in themselves.

5. Matter and Form


A very crude definition of matter would be that it is the ‘stuff’ out of which a thing is made, whereas form is signified by the organisation that the matter takes. A common example used by Aquinas and his contemporaries for explaining matter and form was that of a statue. Consider a marble statue. The marble is the matter of the statue whereas the shape signifies the form of the statue. The marble is the ‘stuff’ out of which the statue is made whereas the shape signifies the form that the artist decided to give to the statue. On a more metaphysical level, form is the principle whereby the matter has the particular structure that it has, and matter is simply that which stands to be structured in a certain way. It follows from this initial account that matter is a principle of potency in a thing; since if the matter is that which stands to be structured in a certain way, matter can be potentially an indefinite number of forms. Form on the other hand is not potentially one thing or another; form as form is the kind of thing that it is and no other.

On Aquinas’s account, there are certain levels of matter/form composition. On one level we can think of the matter of a statue as being the marble whereas we can think of the shape of the statue as signifying the form. But on a different level with can think of the marble as signifying the form and something more fundamental being the matter. For instance, before the marble was formed into the statue by the sculptor, it was a block of marble, already with a certain form that made it ‘marble’. At this level, the marble cannot be the matter of the thing, since its being marble and not, say, granite, is its form. Thus, there is a more fundamental level of materiality that admits of being formed in such a way that the end product is marble or granite, and at a higher level, this formed matter stands as matter for the artist when constructing the statue.

If we think of matter as without any form, we come to the notion of prime matter, and this is a type of matter that is totally unformed, pure materiality itself. Prime matter is the ultimate subject of form, and in itself indefinable; we can only understand prime matter through thinking of matter as wholly devoid of form. As wholly devoid of form prime matter is neither a substance nor any of the other categories of being; prime matter, as pure potency, cannot in fact express any concrete mode of being, since as pure potency is does not exist except as potency. Thus, prime matter is not a thing actually existing, since it has no principle of act rendering it actually existing.

Matter can be considered in two senses: (i) as designated and (ii) as undesignated. Designated matter is the type of matter to which one can point and of which one can make use. It is the matter that we see around us. Undesignated matter is a type of matter that we simply consider through the use of our reason; it is the abstracted notion of matter. For instance, the actual flesh and bones that make up an individual man are instances of designated matter, whereas the notions of ‘flesh’ and ‘bones’ are abstracted notions of certain types of matter and these are taken to enter into the definition of ‘man’ as such. Designated matter is what individuates some form. As noted, the form of a thing is the principle of its material organisation. A thing’s form then can apply to many different things insofar as those things are all organised in the same way. The form then can be said to be universal, since it remains the same but is predicated over different things. As signifying the actual matter that is organised in the thing, designated matter individuates the form to ‘this’ or ‘that’ particular thing, thereby ensuring individuals (Socrates, Plato, Aristotle) of the same form (man).

Given that form is the principle of organisation of a thing’s matter, or the thing’s intelligible nature, form can be of two kinds. On the one hand, form can be substantial, organising the matter into the kind of thing that the substance is. On the other hand, form can be accidental, organising some part of an already constituted substance. We can come to a greater understanding of substantial and accidental form if we consider their relation to matter. Substantial form always informs prime matter and in doing so it brings a new substance into existence; accidental form simply informs an already existing substance (an already existing composite of substantial form and prime matter), and in doing so it simply modifies some substance. Given that substantial form always informs prime matter, there can be only one substantial form of a thing; for if substantial form informs prime matter, any other form that may accrue to a thing is posterior to it and simply informs an already constituted substance, which is the role of accidental form. Thus, there can only be one substantial form of a thing.

As stated above, essence is signified by the definition of a thing; essence is the definable nature of the thing that exists. A thing’s essence then is its definition. It follows that on Thomas’s account the essence of a thing is the composition of its matter and form, where matter here is taken as undesignated matter. Contrary to contemporary theories of essence, Aquinas does not, strictly speaking, take essence to be what is essential to the thing in question, where the latter is determined by a thing’s possessing some property or set of properties in all possible worlds. In the latter context, the essence of a thing comprises its essential properties, properties that are true of it in all possible worlds; but this is surely not Aquinas’s view. For Aquinas, the essence of a thing is not the conglomeration of those properties that it would possess in all possible worlds, but the composition of matter and form. On a possible-worlds view of essence, the essence of a thing could not signify the matter/form composite as it is in this actual world, since such a composite could be different in some possible world and therefore not uniform across all possible worlds. Thus, Aquinas does not adopt a possible-worlds view of essence; he envisages the essence of a thing as the definition or quiddity of the thing existing in this world, not as it would exist in all possible worlds.

6. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • St Thomas Aquinas, Summa Theologiae, trans. Fathers of the English Dominican Province (1948), U.S.A: Christian Classics.
    • Aquinas’s philosophical and theological masterpiece; Part I (Prima Pars) is the most important for Thomas’s metaphysical thought.
  • St Thomas Aquinas, The Divisions and Methods of the Sciences: Questions V and VI of his Commentary on the De Trinitate of Boethius, trans. Armand Maurer (1953) Toronto: Pontifical Institute of Medieval Studies.
    • A detailed consideration by Thomas of the divisions and methods of the sciences.
  • St Thomas Aquinas, On Being and Essence, trans. Armand Maurer (1968), Toronto: Pontifical Institute Medieval Studies.
    • An excellent summary from Aquinas himself of his metaphysical views.
  • St Thomas Aquinas, Summa Contra Gentiles, trans. A.C Pegis (1975), Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press.
    • One of Aquinas’s great Summae; books I and II are most important for Thomas’s metaphysical thought.
  • St Thomas Aquinas, Commentary on Aristotle’s Metaphysics, trans. John P. Rowan (1995), U.S.A: Dumb Ox Books.
    • A direct commentary on the Metaphysics of Aristotle.
  • St Thomas Aquinas, Aquinas on matter and form and the elements: a translation and interpretation of the De principiis naturae and the De mixtione elementorum of St. Thomas Aquinas, trans. Joseph Bobik (1998), Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press.
    • A translation of and commentary on Aqiunas’s works on ‘matter and form and the elements’.

b. General Studies

  • Clarke, W.N., Explorations in Metaphysics — Being, God, Person (1994), Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press.
  • Clarke, W.N., The One and the Many — A Contemporary Thomistic Metaphysics (2001), Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press.
  • Copleston, F., Aquinas (1955), London: Penguin.
  • Davies, B., The Thought of Thomas Aquinas (1993), Oxford: Clarendon Paperbacks.
  • Fabro, C., La Nozione Metafisica di Partecipazione secondo S. Tommaso d’Aquino (1950), Turin: Società Editrice Internazionale.
  • Fabro, C., Participation et causalité selon S. Thomas d’Aquin (1961), Louvain: Publications Universaitaires.
    • Both works by Fabro were groundbreaking for their uncovering the Platonic influences in Aquinas’s thought.
  • de Finance, J., Être et agir dans la philosophie de Saint Thomas (1960), Rome: Librairie Éditrice de l’Université Grégorienne.
  • Geiger, L-B., La participation dans la philosophie de s. Thomas d’Aquin (1953), Paris: Librairie Philosophique J. Vrin.
    • As with Fabro’s work, Geiger’s too uncovers the Platonic influences in Aquinas’s thought.
  • Kenny, A., Aquinas on Being (2003), Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Klima, G., ‘Contemporary “Essentialism” vs. Aristotelian Essentialism’, in John Haldane, ed., Mind Metaphysics, and Value in the Thomistic and Analytical Traditions (2002), Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press.
  • Kretzman, N., & Stump, E. eds. The Cambridge Companion to Aquinas (1993), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Long, S., ‘On the Natural Knowledge of the Real Distinction’, Nova et Vetera (2003), 1:1.
  • Long, S., ‘Aquinas on Being and Logicism’, New Blackfriars (2005), 86.
  • Owens, J., ‘A Note on the Approach to Thomistic Metaphysics’, The New Scholasticism (1954), 28:4.
  • Owens, J., ‘Quiddity and the Real Distinction in St Thomas Aquinas’, Mediaeval Studies (1965), 27.
  • Owens, J., The Doctrine of Being in the Aristotelian Metaphysics (1978), Toronto: Pontifical Institute of Medieval Studies.
  • Owens, J., St Thomas Aquinas on the Existence of God — The Collected Papers of Joseph Owens ed. Catan, John. R. (1980), Albany: State University of New York Press.
  • Owens, J., ‘Stages and Distinction in De Ente’, The Thomist, (1981), 45.
  • Owens, J., An Elementary Christian Metaphysics (1985), Houston, Texas: Bruce Publishing Company.
  • Owens, J., An Interpretation of Existence (1985), Texas: Center for Thomistic Studies — University of St Thomas.
  • Owens, J., ‘Aquinas’s Distinction at De Ente et Essentia 4.119 — 123’, Mediaeval Studies (1986), 48.
  • Patt, W. ‘Aquinas’s Real Distinction and some Interpretations’, The New Scholasticism (1988), 62:1.
  • Stump, E., Aquinas (2003), London-New York: Routledge.
    • Part I, Chapter I, offers a very good survey of Aquinas’s metaphysics, but leaves out details of his theory of essence/existence composition. Pp. 36 – 44 are particularly illuminating on matter and form, substance and accident.
  • Torrell, J.-P., Saint Thomas Aquinas: The Person and His Work, trans. Robert Royal (1996), Washington: The Catholic University of America Press.
    • This is the most up-to-date publication on Aquinas’s life and work.
  • te Velde R. A., Participation and Substantiality in Thomas Aquinas (1995), Leiden-New York-Cologne: E.J. Brill.
  • Wippel, J., 1979: ‘Aquinas’s Route to the Real Distinction’, The Thomist, 43.
  • Wippel, J.,  Metaphysical Themes in Thomas Aquinas (1984), USA: The Catholic University of America Press.
  • Wippel, J.,  The Metaphysical Thought of Thomas Aquinas (2000), USA: The Catholic University of America Press.
  • Wippel, J.,  Metaphysical Themes in Thomas Aquinas II (2007), USA: The Catholic University of America Press.
    • Wippel’s work is generally taken to be essential for scholarly work on Aquinas’s metaphysical thought.


Author Information

Gaven Kerr
Queen's University Belfast
Northern Ireland

David Hume (1711—1776)

“Hume is our Politics, Hume is our Trade, Hume is our Philosophy, Hume is our Religion.” This statement by nineteenth century philosopher James Hutchison Stirling reflects the unique position in intellectual thought held by Scottish philosopher David Hume. Part of Hume’s fame and importance owes to his boldly skeptical approach to a range of philosophical subjects. In epistemology, he questioned common notions of personal identity, and argued that there is no permanent “self” that continues over time. He dismissed standard accounts of causality and argued that our conceptions of cause-effect relations are grounded in habits of thinking, rather than in the perception of causal forces in the external world itself. He defended the skeptical position that human reason is inherently contradictory, and it is only through naturally-instilled beliefs that we can navigate our way through common life. In the philosophy of religion, he argued that it is unreasonable to believe testimonies of alleged miraculous events, and he hints, accordingly, that we should reject religions that are founded on miracle testimonies. Against the common belief of the time that God’s existence could be proven through a design or causal argument, Hume offered compelling criticisms of standard theistic proofs. He also advanced theories on the origin of popular religious beliefs, grounding such notions in human psychology rather than in rational argument or divine revelation. The larger aim of his critique was to disentangle philosophy from religion and thus allow philosophy to pursue its own ends without rational over-extension or psychological corruption.  In moral theory, against the common view that God plays an important role in the creation and reinforcement of moral values, he offered one of the first purely secular moral theories, which grounded morality in the pleasing and useful consequences that result from our actions. He introduced the term “utility” into our moral vocabulary, and his theory is the immediate forerunner to the classic utilitarian views of Jeremy Bentham and John Stuart Mill. He is famous for the position that we cannot derive ought from is, the view that statements of moral obligation cannot simply be deduced from statements of fact. Some see Hume as an early proponent of the emotivist metaethical view that moral judgments principally express our feelings. He also made important contributions to aesthetic theory with his view that there is a uniform standard of taste within human nature, in political theory with his critique of social contractarianism, and economic theory with his anti-mercantilist views. As a philosophical historian, he defended the conservative view that British governments are best run through a strong monarchy.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Origin and Association of Ideas
  3. Epistemological Issues
    1. Space
    2. Time
    3. Necessary Connection between Causes and Effects
    4. External Objects
    5. Personal Identity
    6. Free Will
  4. Skepticism
  5. Theory of the Passions
  6. Religious Belief
    1. Miracles
    2. Psychology of Religious Belief
    3. Arguments for God’s Existence
  7. Moral Theory
  8. Aesthetic, Political, and Economic Theory
  9. History and Philosophy
  10. References and Further Reading
    1. Recent Editions of Hume’s Writings
    2. Chronological List of Hume’s Publications
    3. Biographies, Letters, Manuscripts
    4. Bibliographies
    5. Works on Hume

1. Life


David Hume was born in 1711 to a moderately wealthy family from Berwickshire Scotland, near Edinburgh. His background was politically Whiggish and religiously Calvinistic. As a child he faithfully attended the local Church of Scotland, pastored by his uncle. Hume was educated by his widowed mother until he left for the University of Edinburgh at the age of eleven. His letters describe how as a young student he took religion seriously and obediently followed a list of moral guidelines taken from The Whole Duty of Man, a popular Calvinistic devotional.

Leaving the University of Edinburgh around the age of fifteen to pursue his education privately, he was encouraged to consider a career in law, but his interests soon turned to philosophy. During these years of private study he began raising serious questions about religion, as he recounts in the following letter:

Tis not long ago that I burn’d an old Manuscript Book, wrote before I was twenty; which contain’d, Page after Page, the gradual Progress of my Thoughts on that head [i.e. religious belief]. It begun with an anxious Search after Arguments, to confirm the common Opinion: Doubts stole in, dissipated, return’d, were again dissipated, return’d again [To Gilbert Elliot of Minto, March 10, 1751].

Although his manuscript book was destroyed, several pages of his study notes survive from his early twenties. These show a preoccupation with proofs for God’s existence as well as atheism, particularly as he read on these topics in classical Greek and Latin texts and in Pierre Bayle’s skeptical Historical and Critical Dictionary. During these years of private study, some of which were in France, he composed his three-volume Treatise of Human Nature, which was published anonymously in two installments before he was thirty (1739, 1740). The Treatise explores several philosophical topics such as space, time, causality, external objects, the passions, free will, and morality, offering original and often skeptical appraisals of these notions. Book I of the Treatise was unfavorably reviewed in the History of the Works of the Learned with a succession of sarcastic comments. Although scholars today recognized it as a philosophical masterpiece, Hume was disappointed with the minimal interest his book spawned and said that “It fell dead-born from the press, without reaching such distinctions even to excite a murmur among the zealots” (My Own Life).

In 1741 and 1742 Hume published his two-volume Essays, Moral and Political, which were written in a popular style and were more successful than the Treatise. In 1744-1745 he was a candidate for the Chair of Moral Philosophy at the University of Edinburgh. The Edinburgh Town Council was responsible for electing a replacement, and critics opposed Hume by condemning his anti-religious writings. Chief among the critics was clergyman William Wishart (d. 1752), the Principal of the University of Edinburgh. Lists of allegedly dangerous propositions from Hume’s Treatise circulated, presumably penned by Wishart himself. In the face of such strong opposition, the Edinburgh Town Council consulted the Edinburgh ministers. Hoping to win over the clergy, Hume composed a point by point reply to the circulating lists of dangerous propositions, which was published as A Letter from a Gentleman to his Friend in Edinburgh. The clergy were not swayed, 12 of the 15 ministers voted against Hume, and he quickly withdrew his candidacy. In 1745 Hume accepted an invitation from General St Clair to attend him as secretary. He wore the uniform of an officer, and accompanied the general on an expedition against Canada (which ended in an incursion on the coast of France) and to an embassy post in the courts of Vienna and Turin.

Because of the success of his Essays, Hume was convinced that the poor reception of his Treatise was caused by its style rather than by its content. In 1748 he published his Enquiry Concerning Human Understanding, a more popular rendition of portions of Book I of the Treatise. The Enquiry also includes two sections not found in the Treatise: “Of Miracles” and a dialogue titled “Of a Particular Providence and of a Future State.” Each section contains direct attacks on religious belief. In 1751 he published his Enquiry Concerning the Principles of Morals, which recasts parts of Book III of the Treatise in a very different form. The work establishes a system of morality upon utility and human sentiments alone, and without appeal to divine moral commands. By the end of the century Hume was recognized as the founder of the moral theory of utility, and utilitarian political theorist Jeremy Bentham acknowledged Hume’s direct influence upon him. The same year Hume also published his Political Discourses, which drew immediate praise and influenced economic thinkers such as Adam Smith, William Godwin, and Thomas Malthus.

In 1751-1752 Hume sought a philosophy chair at the University of Glasgow, and was again unsuccessful. In 1752 his new employment as librarian of the Advocate’s Library in Edinburgh provided him with the resources to pursue his interest in history. There, he wrote much of his highly successful six-volume History of England (published from 1754 to 1762). The first volume was unfavorably received, partially for its defense of Charles I, and partially for two sections which attack Christianity. In one passage Hume notes that the first Protestant reformers were fanatical or “inflamed with the highest enthusiasm” in their opposition to Roman Catholic domination. In the second passage he labels Roman Catholicism a superstition which “like all other species of superstition. . .  rouses the vain fears of unhappy mortals.” The most vocal attack against Hume’s History came from Daniel MacQueen in his 300 page Letters on Mr. Hume’s History. MacQueen scrutinizes the first volume of Hume’s work, exposing all the allegedly “loose and irreligious sneers” Hume makes against Christianity. Ultimately, this negative response led Hume to delete the two controversial passages from succeeding editions of the History.

Around this time Hume also wrote his two most substantial works on religion: The Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion and The Natural History of Religion. The Natural History appeared in 1757, but, on the advice of friends who wished to steer Hume away from religious controversy, the Dialogues remained unpublished until 1779, three years after his death. The Natural History aroused controversy even before it was made public. In 1756 a volume of Hume’s essays titled Five Dissertations was printed and ready for distribution. The essays included (1) “The Natural History of Religion;” (2) “Of the Passions;” (3) “Of Tragedy;” (4) “Of Suicide;” and (5) “Of the Immortality of the Soul.” The latter two essays made direct attacks on common religious doctrines by defending a person’s moral right to commit suicide and by criticizing the idea of life after death. Early copies were passed around, and Hume’s publisher was threatened with prosecution if the book was distributed as it was. The printed copies of Five Dissertations were then physically altered by removing the essays on suicide and immortality, and inserting a new essay “Of the Standard of Taste” in their place. Hume also took this opportunity to alter two particularly offending paragraphs in the Natural History. The essays were then bound with the new title Four Dissertations and distributed in January, 1757.

In the years following Four Dissertations, Hume completed his last major literary work, The History of England, which gave him a reputation as an historian that equaled, if not overshadowed, his reputation as a philosopher.  In 1763, at age 50, he was invited to accompany the Earl of Hertford to the embassy in Paris, with a near prospect of being his secretary. He eventually accepted, and remarks at the reception he received in Paris “from men and women of all ranks and stations.” He returned to Edinburgh in 1766, and continued developing relations with the greatest minds of the time. Among these was Jean Jacques Rousseau who in 1766 was ordered out of Switzerland by the government in Berne. Hume offered Rousseau refuge in England and secured him a government pension. In England, Rousseau became suspicious of plots, and publicly charged Hume with conspiring to ruin his character, under the appearance of helping him. Hume published a pamphlet defending his actions and was exonerated. Another secretary appointment took him away from 1767-1768. Returning again to Edinburgh, his remaining years were spent revising and refining his published works, and socializing with friends in Edinburgh’s intellectual circles. In 1770, fellow Scotsman James Beattie published one of the harshest attacks on Hume’s philosophy to ever appear in print, entitled An Essay on the Nature and Immutability of Truth in Opposition to Sophistry and Scepticism. Hume was upset by Beattie’s relentless verbal attacks against him in the work, but the book made Beattie famous and King George III, who admired it, awarded Beattie a pension of £200 per year.

In 1776, at age sixty-five, Hume died from an internal disorder which had plagued him for many months. After his death, his name took on new significance as several of his previously unpublished works appeared. The first was a brief autobiography, My Own Life, but even this unpretentious work aroused controversy. As his friends, Adam Smith and S.J. Pratt, published affectionate eulogies describing how he died with no concern for an afterlife, religious critics responded by condemning this unjustifiable admiration of Hume’s infidelity. Two years later, in 1779, Hume’s Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion appeared. Again, the response was mixed. Admirers of Hume considered it a masterfully written work, while religious critics branded it as dangerous to religion. Finally, in 1782, Hume’s two suppressed essays on suicide and immortality were published. Their reception was almost unanimously negative.

2. Origin and Association of Ideas

Drawing heavily on John Locke’s empiricism, the opening sections of both the Treatise and Enquiry discuss the origins of mental perceptions as laid out in the following categorical scheme:


A. Ideas

1. From memory

2. From imagination

a. From fancy

b. From understanding

(1) Involving relations of ideas

(2) Involving matters of fact

B. Impressions

1. Of sensation (external)

2. Of reflection (internal)

Hume begins by dividing all mental perceptions between ideas (thoughts) and impressions (sensations and feelings), and then makes two central claims about the relation between them. First, advancing what is commonly called Hume’s copy thesis, he argues that all ideas are ultimately copied from impressions. That is, for any idea we select, we can trace the component parts of that idea to some external sensation or internal feeling. This claim places Hume squarely in the empiricist tradition, and he regularly uses this principle as a test for determining the content of an idea under consideration. As proof of the copy thesis, Hume challenges anyone who denies it “to shew a simple impression, that has not a correspondent idea, or a simple idea, that has not a correspondent impression” (Treatise, 1.1.1). Second, advancing what we may call Hume’s liveliness thesis, he argues that ideas and impressions differ only in terms of liveliness. For example, my impression of a tree is simply more vivid than my idea of that tree. One of his early critics, Lord Monboddo (1714–1799) pointed out an important implication of the liveliness thesis, which Hume himself presumably hides. Most modern philosophers held that ideas reside in our spiritual minds, whereas impressions originate in our physical bodies. So, when Hume blurs the distinction between ideas and impressions, he is ultimately denying the spiritual nature of ideas and instead grounding them in our physical nature. In short, all of our mental operations—including our most rational ideas—are physical in nature. As Monboddo writes, “One consequence, which Mr Hume has drawn from this doctrine, is, that, as our Mind can only operate by the organs of the Body, it must perish with the Body” (Ancient Metaphysics, 1782, 2.2.2).

Hume goes on to explain that there are several mental faculties that are responsible for producing our various ideas. He initially divides ideas between those produced by the memory, and those produced by the imagination. The memory is a faculty that conjures up ideas based on experiences as they happened. For example, the memory I have of my drive to the store is a comparatively accurate copy of my previous sense impressions of that experience. The imagination, by contrast, is a faculty that breaks apart and combines ideas, thus forming new ones. Hume uses the familiar example of a golden mountain: this idea is a combination of an idea of gold and an idea of a mountain. As our imagination takes our most basic ideas and leads us to form new ones, it is directed by three principles of association, namely, resemblance, contiguity, and cause and effect. By virtue of resemblance, an illustration or sketch, of a person leads me to an idea of that actual person. The idea of one apartment in a building leads me to think of the apartment contiguous to—or next to—the first. The thought of a scar on my hand leads me to think of a broken piece of glass that caused the scar.

As indicated in the above chart, our more complex ideas of the imagination are further divided between two categories. Some imaginative ideas represent flights of the fancy, such as the idea of a golden mountain; however, other imaginative ideas represent solid reasoning, such as predicting the trajectory of a thrown ball. The fanciful ideas are derived from the faculty of the fancy, and are the source of fantasies, superstitions, and bad philosophy. By contrast, sound ideas are derived from the faculty of the understanding—or reason—and are of two types: (1) involving relations of ideas; or (2) involving matters of fact. A relation of ideas (or relation between ideas) is a mathematical relation that is “discoverable by the mere operation of thought, without dependence on what is anywhere existent in the universe,” such as the mathematical statement “the square of the hypotenuse is equal to the square of the two sides” (Enquiry, 4). By contrast, a matter of fact, for Hume, is any object or circumstance which has physical existence, such as “the sun will rise tomorrow”. This split between relations of ideas and matters of fact is commonly called “Hume’s Fork”, and Hume himself uses it as a radical tool for distinguishing between well-founded ideas of the understanding, and unfounded ideas of the fancy. He dramatically makes this point at the conclusion of his Enquiry:

When we run over libraries, persuaded of these principles, what havoc must we make? If we take in our hand any volume; of divinity or school metaphysics, for instance; let us ask, Does it contain any abstract reasoning concerning quantity or number? No. Does it contain any experimental reasoning concerning matter of fact and existence? No. Commit it then to the flames: For it can contain nothing but sophistry and illusion (Enquiry, 12).

For Hume, when we imaginatively exercise our understanding regarding relations of ideas and matters of fact, our minds are guided by seven philosophical or “reasoning” relations, which are as follows:

Principles of reasoning concerning relations of ideas (involving demonstration): (1) resemblance; (2) contrariety; (3) degrees in quality; and (4) proportions in quantity or number

Principles of reasoning concerning matters of fact (involving judgments of probability): (5) identity; (6) relations in time and place; and (7) causation

Human understanding and reasoning at its best, then, involves ideas that are grounded in the above seven principles.

3. Epistemological Issues


Much of Hume’s epistemology is driven by a consideration of philosophically important issues, such as space and time, cause-effect, external objects, personal identity, and free will. In his analysis of these issues in the Treatise, he repeatedly does three things. First, he skeptically argues that we are unable to gain complete knowledge of some important philosophical notion under consideration. Second, he shows how the understanding gives us a very limited idea of that notion. Third, he explains how some erroneous views of that notion are grounded in the fancy, and he accordingly recommends that we reject those erroneous ideas. We will follow this three-part scheme as we consider Hume’s discussions of various topics.

a. Space

On the topic of space, Hume argues that our proper notions of space are confined to our visual and tactile experiences of the three-dimensional world, and we err if we think of space more abstractly and independently of those visual and tactile experiences. In essence, our proper notion of space is like what Locke calls a “secondary quality” of an object, which is spectator dependent, meaning grounded in the physiology of our perceptual mental processes. Thus, our proper notion of space is not like a “primary quality” that refers to some external state of affairs independent of our perceptual mental process. Following the above three-part scheme, (1) Hume skeptically argues that we have no ideas of infinitely divisible space (Treatise, (2) When accounting for the idea we do have of space, he argues that “the idea of space is convey’d to the mind by two senses, the sight and touch; nor does any thing ever appear extended, that is not either visible or tangible” (Treatise, Further, he argues that these objects—which are either visible or tangible—are composed of finite atoms or corpuscles, which are themselves “endow’d with colour and solidity.” These impressions are then “comprehended” or conceived by the imagination; it is from the structuring of these impressions that we obtain a limited idea of space. (3) In contrast to this idea of space, Hume argues that we frequently presume to have an idea of space that lacks visibility or solidity. He accounts for this erroneous notion in terms of a mistaken association that people naturally make between visual and tactile space (Treatise,

b. Time

Hume’s treatment of our idea of time is like his treatment of the idea of space, in that our proper idea of time is like a secondary quality, grounded in our mental operations, not a primary quality grounded in some external phenomenon beyond our experience. (1) He first maintains that we have no idea of infinitely divisible time (Treatise, (2) He then notes Locke’s point that our minds operate at a range of speeds that are “fix’d by the original nature and constitution of the mind, and beyond which no influence of external objects on the senses is ever able to hasten or retard our thought” (Treatise, The idea of time, then, is not a simple idea derived from a simple impression; instead, it is a copy of impressions as they are perceived by the mind at its fixed speed (Treatise, (3) In contrast to this limited view of time, he argues that we frequently entertain a faulty notion of time that does not involve change or succession. The psychological account of this erroneous view is that we mistake time for the cause of succession instead of seeing it as the effect (Treatise,

c. Necessary Connection between Causes and Effects

According to Hume, the notion of cause-effect is a complex idea that is made up of three more foundational ideas: priority in time, proximity in space, and necessary connection. Concerning priority in time, if I say that event A causes event B, one thing I mean is that A occurs prior to B. If B were to occur before A, then it would be absurd to say that A was the cause of B. Concerning the idea of proximity, if I say that A causes B, then I mean that B is in proximity to, or close to A. For example, if I throw a rock, and at that moment someone’s window in China breaks, I would not conclude that my rock broke a window on the other side of the world. The broken window and the rock must be in proximity with each other. Priority and proximity alone, however, do not make up our entire notion of causality. For example, if I sneeze and the lights go out, I would not conclude that my sneeze was the cause, even though the conditions of priority and proximity were fulfilled. We also believe that there is a necessary connection between cause A and effect B. During the modern period of philosophy, philosophers thought of necessary connection as a power or force connecting two events. When billiard ball A strikes billiard ball B, there is a power that the one event imparts to the other. In keeping with his empiricist copy thesis, that all ideas are copied from impressions, Hume tries to uncover the experiences which give rise to our notions of priority, proximity, and necessary connection. The first two are easy to explain. Priority traces back to our various experiences of time. Proximity traces back to our various experiences of space. But what is the experience which gives us the idea of necessary connection? This notion of necessary connection is the specific focus of Hume’s analysis of cause-effect.

Hume’s view is that our proper idea of necessary connection is like a secondary quality that is formed by the mind, and not, like a primary quality, a feature of the external world. (1) He skeptically argues that we cannot get an idea of necessary connection by observing it through sensory experiences (Treatise, ff.). We have no external sensory impression of causal power when we observe cause-effect relationships; all that we ever see is cause A constantly conjoined with effect B. Neither does it arise from an internal impression, such as when we introspectively reflect on willed bodily motions or willing the creation of thoughts. These internal experiences are too elusive, and nothing in them can give content to our idea of necessary connection. (2) The idea we have of necessary connection arises as follows: we experience a constant conjunction of events A and B— repeated sense experiences where events resembling A are always followed by events resembling B. This produces a habit such that upon any further appearance of A, we expect B to follow. This, in turn, produces an internal feeling of expectation “to pass from an object to the idea of its usual attendant,” which is the impression from which the idea of necessary connection is copied (Treatise, (3) A common but mistaken notion on this topic is that necessity resides within the objects themselves. He explains this mistaken belief by the natural tendency we have to impute subjectively perceived qualities to external things (Treatise,

d. External Objects


Hume’s view on external objects is that the mind is programmed to form some concept of the external world, although this concept or idea is really just a fabrication. (1) Hume’s skeptical claim here is that we have no valid conception of the existence of external things (Treatise, (2) Nevertheless, he argues that we have an unavoidable “vulgar” or common belief in the continued existence of objects, and this idea he accounts for. His explanation is lengthy, but involves the following features. Perceptions of objects are disjointed and have no unity in and of themselves (Treatise, In an effort to organize our perceptions, we first naturally assume that there is no distinction between our perceptions and the objects that are perceived (this is the so-called “vulgar” view of perception). We then conflate all ideas (of perceptions), which put our minds in similar dispositions (Treatise,; that is, we associate resembling ideas and attribute identity to their causes. Consequently, we naturally invent the continued and external existence of the objects (or perceptions) that produced these ideas (Treatise, Lastly, we go on to believe in the existence of these objects because of the force of the resemblance between ideas (Treatise, Although this belief is philosophically unjustified, Hume feels he has given an accurate account of how we inevitably arrive at the idea of external existence. (3) In contrast to the previous explanation of this idea, he recommends that we doubt a more sophisticated but erroneous notion of existence—the so-called philosophical view—which distinguishes between perceptions and the external objects that cause perceptions. The psychological motivation for accepting this view is this: our imagination tells us that resembling perceptions have a continued existence, yet our reflection tells us that they are interrupted. Appealing to both forces, we ascribe interruption to perceptions and continuance to objects (Treatise,

e. Personal Identity

Regarding the issue of personal identity, (1) Hume’s skeptical claim is that we have no experience of a simple, individual impression that we can call the self—where the “self” is the totality of a person’s conscious life. He writes, “For my part, when I enter most intimately into what I call myself, I always stumble on some particular perception or other, of heat or cold, light or shade, love or hatred, pain or pleasure. I never can catch myself at any time without a perception, and never can observe anything but the perception” (Treatise, (2) Even though my perceptions are fleeting and I am a bundle of different perceptions, I nevertheless have some idea of personal identity, and that must be accounted for (Treatise, Because of the associative principles, the resemblance or causal connection within the chain of my perceptions gives rise to an idea of myself, and memory extends this idea past my immediate perceptions (Treatise, ff.). (3) A common abuse of the notion of personal identity occurs when the idea of a soul or unchanging substance is added to give us a stronger or more unified concept of the self (Treatise,

f. Free Will

On the issue of free will and determinism—or “liberty” and “necessity” in Hume’s terminology—Hume defends necessity. (1) He first argues that “all actions of the will have particular causes” (Treatise,, and so there is no such thing as an uncaused willful action. (2) He then defends the notion of a will that consistently responds to prior motivational causes: “our actions have a constant union with our motives, tempers, and circumstances” (Treatise, These motives produce actions that have the same causal necessity observed in cause-effect relations that we see in external objects, such as when billiard ball A strikes and moves billiard ball B. In the same way, we regularly observe the rock-solid connection between motive A and action B, and we rely on that predictable connection in our normal lives. Suppose that a traveler, in recounting his observation of the odd behavior of natives in a distant country, told us that identical motives led to entirely different actions among these natives.  We would not believe the traveler’s report. In business, politics, and military affairs, our leaders expect predicable behavior from us insofar as the same motives within us will always result in us performing the same action. A prisoner who is soon to be executed will assume that the motivations and actions of the prison guards and the executioner are so rigidly fixed that these people will mechanically carry out their duties and perform the execution, with no chance of a change of heart (Treatise, ff.).  (3) Lastly, Hume explains why people commonly believe in an uncaused will (Treatise, ff.). One explanation is that people erroneously believe they have a feeling of liberty when performing actions. The reason is that, when we perform actions, we feel a kind of “looseness or indifference” in how they come about, and some people wrongly see this as “an intuitive proof of human liberty” (Treatise,

In the Treatise Hume rejects the notion of liberty completely. While he gives no definition of “liberty” in that work, he argues that the notion is incompatible with necessity, and, at best, “liberty” simply means chance. In the Enquiry, however, he takes a more compatiblist approach. All human actions are caused by specific prior motives, but liberty and necessity are reconcilable when we define liberty as “a power of acting or not acting, according to the determinations of the will” (Enquiry, 8). Nothing in this definition of liberty is in conflict with the notion of necessity.

4. Skepticism

In all of the above discussions on epistemological topics, Hume performs a balancing act between making skeptical attacks (step 1) and offering positive theories based on natural beliefs (step 2). In the conclusion to Book 1, though, he appears to elevate his skepticism to a higher level and exposes the inherent contradictions in even his best philosophical theories. He notes three such contradictions. One centers on what we call induction. Our judgments based on past experience all contain elements of doubt; we are then impelled to make a judgment about that doubt, and since this judgment is also based on past experience it will in turn produce a new doubt. Once again, though, we are impelled to make a judgment about this second doubt, and the cycle continues. He concludes that “no finite object can subsist under a decrease repeated in infinitum.” A second contradiction involves a conflict between two theories of external perception, each of which our natural reasoning process leads us to.  One is our natural inclination to believe that we are directly seeing objects as they really are, and the other is the more philosophical view that we only ever see mental images or copies of external objects. The third contradiction involves a conflict between causal reasoning and belief in the continued existence of matter. After listing these contradictions, Hume despairs over the failure of his metaphysical reasoning:

The intense view of these manifold contradictions and imperfections in human reason has so wrought upon me, and heated my brain, that I am ready to reject all belief and reasoning, and can look upon no opinion even as more probable or likely than another [Treatise,].

He then pacifies his despair by recognizing that nature forces him to set aside his philosophical speculations and return to the normal activities of common life. He sees, though, that in time he will be drawn back into philosophical speculation in order to attack superstition and educate the world.

Hume’s emphasis on these conceptual contradictions is a unique aspect of his skepticism, and if any part of his philosophy can be designated “Humean skepticism” it is this.  However, during the course of his writing the Treatise his view of the nature of these contradictions changed. At first he felt that these contradictions were restricted to theories about the external world, but theories about the mind itself would be free from them, as he explains here:

The essence and composition of external bodies are so obscure, that we must necessarily, in our reasonings, or rather conjectures concerning them, involve ourselves in contradictions and absurdities. But as the perceptions of the mind are perfectly known, and I have us'd all imaginable caution in forming conclusions concerning them, I have always hop'd to keep clear of those contradictions, which have attended every other system [Treatise,].

When composing the Appendix to the Treatise a year later, he changed his mind and felt that theories about the mind would also have contradictions:

I had entertained some hopes, that however deficient our theory of the intellectual world might be, it wou'd be free from those contradictions, and absurdities, which seem to attend every explication, that human reason can give of the material world. But upon a more strict review of the section concerning I find myself involv'd in such a labyrinth, that, I must confess, I neither know how to correct my former opinions, nor how to render them consistent. If this be not a good general reason for scepticism, 'tis at least a sufficient one (if I were not already abundantly supplied) for me to entertain a diffidence and modesty in all my decisions [Treatise, Appendix].

Thus, in the Treatise, the skeptical bottom line is that even our best theories about both physical and mental phenomena will be plagued with contradictions. In the concluding section of his Enquiry, Hume again addresses the topic of skepticism, but treats the matter somewhat differently: he rejects extreme skepticism but accepts skepticism in a more moderate form. He associates extreme Pyrrhonian skepticism with blanket attacks on all reasoning about the external world, abstract reasoning about space and time, or causal reasoning about matters of fact. He argues, though, that we must reject such skepticism since “no durable good can ever result from it.” Instead, he recommends a more moderate or Academic skepticism that tones down Pyrrhonism by, first, exercising caution and modesty in our judgments, and, second,  by restricting our speculations to abstract reasoning and matters of fact.

5. Theory of the Passions



Like many philosophers of his time, Hume developed a theory of the passions—that is, the emotions—categorizing them and explaining the psychological mechanisms by which they arise in the human mind. His most detailed account is in Book Two of the Treatise. Passions, according to Hume, fall under the category of impressions of reflection (as opposed to impressions of sensation). He opens his discussion with a taxonomy of types of passions, which are outlined here:

Reflective Impressions

1. Calm (reflective pleasures and pains)

2. Violent

a. Direct (desire, aversion, joy, grief, hope, fear)

b. Indirect (love, hate, pride, humility)

He initially divides passions between the calm and the violent. He concedes that this distinction is imprecise, but he explains that people commonly distinguish between types of passions in terms of their degrees of forcefulness. Adding more precision to this common distinction, he maintains that calm passions are emotional feelings of pleasure and pain associated with moral and aesthetic judgments. For example, when I see a person commit a horrible deed, I will experience a feeling of pain. When I view a good work of art, I will experience a feeling of pleasure. In contrast to the calm passions, violent ones constitute the bulk of our emotions, and these divide between direct and indirect passions. For Hume, the key direct passions are desire, aversion, joy, grief, hope, and fear.  They are called “direct” because they arise immediately—without complex reflection on our part—whenever we see something good or bad. For example, if I consider an unpleasant thing, such as being burglarized, then I will feel the passion of aversion. He suggests that sometimes these passions are sparked instinctively—for example, by  my desire for food when I am hungry. Others, though, are not connected with instinct and are more the result of social conditioning. There is an interesting logic to the six direct passions, which Hume borrowed from a tradition that can be traced to ancient Greek Stoicism. We can diagram the relation between the six with this chart:

When good/bad objects are considered abstractly

Desire (towards good objects)

Aversion (towards evil objects)

When good/bad objects are actually present

Joy (towards good objects)

Grief (towards evil objects)

When good/bad objects are only anticipated

Hope (towards good objects)

Fear (towards evil objects)

Compare, for example, the passions that I will experience regarding winning the lottery vs. having my house burglarized. Suppose that I consider them purely in the abstract—or “consider’d simply” as Hume says (Treatise, I will then desire to win the lottery and have an aversion towards being burglarized. Suppose that both situations are actually before me; I will then experience joy over winning the lottery and grief over being burglarized. Suppose, finally, that I know that at some unknown time in the future I will win the lottery and be burglarized. I will then experience hope regarding the lottery and fear of being burglarized.

Hume devotes most of Book 2 to an analysis of the indirect passions, his unique contribution to theories of the passions. The four principal passions are love, hate, pride, and humility. They are called “indirect” since they are the secondary effects of a previous feeling of pleasure and pain. Suppose, for example, that I paint a picture, which gives me a feeling of pleasure. Since I am the artist, I will then experience an additional feeling of pride. He explains in detail the psychological process that triggers indirect passions such as pride. Specifically, he argues that these passions arise from a double relation between ideas and impressions, which we can illustrate here with the passion of pride:

1. I have an initial idea of some possession, or “subject”, such as my painting, and this idea gives me pleasure.

2. Through the associative principle of resemblance, I then immediately associate this feeling of pleasure with a resembling feeling of pride (this association constitutes the first relation in the double relation).

3. This feeling of pride then causes me to have an idea of myself, as the “object” of pride.

4. Through some associative principle such as causality, I then associate the idea of myself with the idea of my painting, which is the “subject” of my pride (this association constitutes the second relation in the double relation).

According to Hume, the three other principal indirect passions arise in parallel ways. For example, if my painting is ugly and causes me pain, then I will experience the secondary passion of humility—perhaps more accurately expressed as “humiliation”. By contrast, if someone else paints a pleasing picture, then this will trigger in me a feeling of love for that artist—perhaps more accurately expressed as “esteem”. If the artist paints a painfully ugly picture, then this will trigger in me a feeling of “hatred” towards the artist—perhaps more accurately expressed as “disesteem”.

One of the most lasting contributions of Hume’s discussion of the passions is his argument that human actions must be prompted by passion, and never can be motivated by reason. Reason, he argues, is completely inert when it comes to motivating conduct, and without some emotion we would not engage in any action. Thus, he writes, “Reason is, and ought only to be the slave of the passions, and can never pretend to any other office than to serve and obey them” (Treatise,

6. Religious Belief

Like many of Hume’s philosophical views, his position on religious belief is also skeptical. Critics of religion during the eighteenth-century needed to express themselves cautiously to avoid being fined, imprisoned, or worse. Sometimes this involved placing controversial views in the mouth of a character in a dialogue. Other times it involved adopting the persona of a deist or fideist as a means of concealing a more extreme religious skepticism. Hume used all of the rhetorical devices at his disposal, and left it to his readers to decode his most controversial conclusions on religious subjects. During the Enlightenment, there were two pillars of traditional Christian belief: natural and revealed religion. Natural religion involves knowledge of God drawn from nature through the use of logic and reason, and typically involves logical proofs regarding the existence and nature of God, such as the causal and design arguments for God’s existence. Revealed religion involves knowledge of God contained in revelation, particularly the Bible, the quintessential examples of which are biblical prophesies and miracles where God intervenes in earthly affairs to confirm the Bible’s message of salvation. Hume attacks both natural and revealed religious beliefs in his various writings.

a. Miracles


In a 1737 letter to Henry Home, Hume states that he intended to include a discussion of miracles in his Treatise, but ultimately left it out for fear of offending readers. His analysis of the subject eventually appeared some ten years later in his essay “Of Miracles” from the Enquiry, and is his first sustained attack on revealed religion. It is probably this main argument to which Hume refers. The first of this two-part essay contains the argument for which Hume is most famous: uniform experience of natural law outweighs the testimony of any alleged miracle. Let us imagine a scale with two balancing pans. In the first pan we place the strongest evidence in support of the occurrence of a miracle. In the second we place our life-long experience of consistent laws of nature. According to Hume, the second pan will always outweigh the first. He writes:

It is experience only, which gives authority to human testimony [regarding miracles]; and it is the same experience, which assures us of the laws of nature. When, therefore, these two kinds of experience are contrary, we have nothing to do but subtract the one from the other, and embrace an opinion, either on one side or the other, with that assurance which arises from the remainder. But according to the principle here explained, this subtraction, with regard to all popular religions, amounts to an entire annihilation [Enquiry, 10.1].

Regardless of how strong the testimony is in favor of a given miracle, it can never come close to counterbalancing the overwhelming experience of unvaried laws of nature. Thus, proportioning one’s belief to the evidence, the wise person must reject the weaker evidence concerning the alleged miracle.

In the second part of “Of Miracles”, Hume discusses four factors that count against the credibility of most miracle testimonies: (1) witnesses of miracles typically lack integrity; (2) we are naturally inclined to enjoy sensational stories, and this has us uncritically perpetuate miracle accounts; (3) miracle testimonies occur most often in less civilized countries; and (4) miracles support rival religious systems and thus discredit each other. But even if a miracle testimony is not encumbered by these four factors, we should still not believe it since it would be contrary to our consistent experience of laws of nature. He concludes his essay with the following cryptic comment about Christian belief in biblical miracles:

upon the whole, we may conclude, that the Christian Religion not only was at first attended with miracles, but even at this day cannot be believed by any reasonable person without one. Mere reason is insufficient to convince us of its veracity: And whoever is moved by Faith to assent to it, is conscious of a continued miracle in his own person, which subverts all the principles of his understanding, and gives him a determination to believe what is most contrary to custom and experience [Enquiry, 10.2].

At face value, his comment suggests a fideist approach to religious belief such as what Pascal recommends. That is, reason is incapable of establishing religious belief, and God must perform a miracle in our lives to make us open to belief through faith. However, according to the eighteenth-century Hume critic John Briggs, Hume’s real point is that belief in Christianity requires “miraculous stupidity” (The Nature of Religious Zeal, 1775).

b. Psychology of Religious Belief

Another attack on revealed religion appears in Hume’s essay “The Natural History of Religion” (1757). It is one of the first systematic attempts to explain the causes of religious belief solely in terms of psychological and sociological factors. We might see the “Natural History” as an answer to a challenge, such as the sort that William Adams poses here in his attack on Hume’s “Of Miracles”:

Whence could the religion and laws of this people [i.e., the Jews] so far exceed those of the wisest Heathens, and come out at once, in their first infancy, thus perfect and entire; when all human systems are found to grow up by degrees, and to ripen, after many improvements; into perfection [An Essay, Part 2]?

According to Adams, only divine intervention can account for the sophistication of the ancient Jewish religion. In the “Natural History,” though, Hume offers an alternative explanation, and one that is grounded solely in human nature, without God’s direct involvement in human history.

The work may be divided into three parts. In the first (Sections 1 and 4), Hume argues that polytheism, and not monotheism, was the original religion of primitive humans. Monotheism, he believes, was only a later development that emerged with the progress of various societies. The standard theory in Judeo-Christian theology was that early humans first believed in a single God, but as religious corruption crept in, people lapsed into polytheism. Hume was the first writer to systematically defend the position of original polytheism. In the second part (Sections 2-3, 5-8), Hume establishes the psychological principles that give rise to popular religious belief. His thesis is that natural instincts—such as fear and the propensity to adulate—are the true causes of popular religious belief, and not divine intervention or rational argument. The third part of this work (Sections 9-15) compares various aspects of polytheism with monotheism, showing that one is no more superior than the other. Both contain points of absurdity. From this he concludes that we should suspend belief on the entire subject of religious truth.

c. Arguments for God’s Existence

Around the same time that Hume was composing his “Natural History of Religion” he was also working on his Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion, which appeared in print two decades later, after his death. As the title of the work implies, it is a critique of natural religion, in contrast with revealed religion. There are three principal characters in the Dialogues. A character named Cleanthes, who espouses religious empiricism, defends the design argument for God’s existence, but rejects the causal argument. Next, a character named Demea, who is a religious rationalist, defends the causal argument for God’s existence, but rejects the design argument. Finally, a character named Philo, who is a religious skeptic, argues against both the design and causal arguments. The main assaults on theistic proofs are conveyed by both Cleanthes and Philo, and, to that extent, both of their critiques likely represent Hume’s views.

The specific version of the causal argument that Hume examines is one by Samuel Clarke (and Leibniz before him). Simplistic versions of the causal argument maintain that when we trace back the causes of things in the universe, the chain of causes cannot go back in time to infinity past; there must be a first cause to the causal sequence, which is God. Clarke’s version differs in that it is theoretically possible for causal sequences of events to trace back through time to infinity past. Thus, we cannot argue that God’s existence is required to initiate a sequence of temporal causes. Nevertheless, Clarke argued, an important fact still needs to be explained: the fact that this infinite temporal sequence of causal events exists at all. Why does something exist rather than nothing? God, then, is the necessary cause of the whole series. In response, the character Cleanthes argues that the flaw in the cosmological argument consists in assuming that there is some larger fact about the universe that needs explaining beyond the particular items in the series itself. Once we have a sufficient explanation for each particular fact in the infinite sequence of events, it makes no sense to inquire about the origin of the collection of these facts. That is, once we adequately account for each individual fact, this constitutes a sufficient explanation of the whole collection. He writes, “Did I show you the particular causes of each individual in a collection of twenty particles of matter, I should think it very unreasonable, should you afterwards ask me, what was the cause of the whole twenty” (Dialogues, 9).

The design argument for God’s existence is that the appearance of design in the natural world is evidence for the existence of a divine designer. The specific version of the argument that Hume examines is one from analogy, as stated here by Cleanthes:

The curious adapting of means to ends, throughout all nature, resembles exactly, though it much exceeds, the productions of human contrivance; of human designs, thought, wisdom, and intelligence. Since, therefore, the effects resemble each other, we are led to infer, by all the rules of analogy, that the causes also resemble; and that the Author of Nature is somewhat similar to the mind of man (Dialogues, 2).

Philo presents several criticisms against the design argument, many of which are now standard in discussions of the issue. According to Philo, the design argument is based on a faulty analogy: we do not know whether the order in nature was the result of design, since, unlike our experience with the creation of machines, we did not witness the formation of the world. In Philo’s words, “will any man tell me with a serious countenance, that an orderly universe must arise from some thought and art like the human, because we have experience of it? To ascertain this reasoning, it were requisite that we had experience of the origin of worlds; and it is not sufficient, surely, that we have seen ships and cities arise from human art and contrivance” (ibid). Further, the vastness of the universe also weakens any comparison with human artifacts. Although the universe is orderly here, it may be chaotic elsewhere. Similarly, if intelligent design is exhibited only in a small fraction of the universe, then we cannot say that it is the productive force of the whole universe. Philo states that “A very small part of this great system, during a very short time, is very imperfectly discovered to us; and do we thence pronounce decisively concerning the origin of the whole?” (ibid). Philo also argues that natural design may be accounted for by nature alone, insofar as matter may contain within itself a principle of order, and “This at once solves all difficulties” (Dialogues, 6). And even if the design of the universe is of divine origin, we are not justified in concluding that this divine cause is a single, all powerful, or all good being. According to Philo, “Whether all these attributes are united in one subject, or dispersed among several independent beings, by what phenomena in nature can we pretend to decide the controversy?” (Dialogues 5).

7. Moral Theory

Hume’s moral theory appears in Book 3 of the Treatise and in An Enquiry Concerning the Principles of Morals (1751). He opens his discussion in the Treatise by telling us what moral approval is not: it is not a rational judgment about either conceptual relations or empirical facts. To make his case he criticizes Samuel Clarke’s rationalistic account of morality, which is that we rationally judge the fitness or unfitness of our actions in reference to eternal laws of righteousness, that are self-evidently known to all humans, just as is our knowledge of mathematical relations. Hume presents several arguments against Clarke’s view, one of which is an analogy from arboreal parricide: a young tree that overgrows and kills its parent exhibits the same alleged relations as a human child killing his parent. “Is not the one tree the cause of the other’s existence; and the latter the cause of the destruction of the former, in the same manner as when a child murders his parent?” (Treatise, If morality is a question of relations, then the young tree is immoral, which is absurd. Hume also argues that moral assessments are not judgments about empirical facts. Take any immoral action, such as willful murder: “examine it in all lights, and see if you can find that matter of fact, or real existence, which you call vice” (Treatise, You will not find any such fact, but only your own feelings of disapproval. In this context Hume makes his point that we cannot derive statements of obligation from statements of fact. When surveying various moral theories, Hume writes, “I am surpriz’d to find, that instead of the usual copulations of propositions, is, and is not, I meet with no proposition that is not connected with an ought or an ought not” (Treatise, This move from is to ought is illegitimate, he argues, and is why people erroneously believe that morality is grounded in rational judgments.

Thus far Hume has only told us what moral approval is not, namely a judgment of reason. So what then does moral approval consist of? It is an emotional response, not a rational one. The details of this part of his theory rest on a distinction between three psychologically distinct players: the moral agent, the receiver, and the moral spectator. The moral agent is the person who performs an action, such as stealing a car; the receiver is the person impacted by the conduct, such as the owner of the stolen car; and the moral spectator is the person who observes and, in this case, disapproves of the agent’s action. This agent-receiver-spectator distinction is the product of earlier moral sense theories championed by the Earl of Shaftesbury (1671-1713), Joseph Butler (1692-1752), and Francis Hutcheson (1694-1747). Most generally, moral sense theories maintained that humans have a faculty of moral perception, similar to our faculties of sensory perception. Just as our external senses detect qualities in external objects, such as colors and shapes, so too does our moral faculty detect good and bad moral qualities in people and actions.

For Hume, all actions of a moral agent are motivated by character traits, specifically either virtuous or vicious character traits. For example, if you donate money to a charity, then your action is motivated by a virtuous character trait. Hume argues that some virtuous character traits are instinctive or natural, such as benevolence, and others are acquired or artificial, such as justice. As an agent, your action will have an effect on a receiver. For example, if you as the agent give food to a starving person, then the receiver will experience an immediately agreeable feeling from your act. Also, the receiver may see the usefulness of your food donation, insofar as eating food will improve his health. When considering the usefulness of your food donation, then, the receiver will receive another agreeable feeling from your act. Finally, I, as a spectator, observe these agreeable feelings that the receiver experiences. I, then, will sympathetically experience agreeable feelings along with the receiver. These sympathetic feelings of pleasure constitute my moral approval of the original act of charity that you, the agent, perform. By sympathetically experiencing this pleasure, I thereby pronounce your motivating character trait to be a virtue, as opposed to a vice. Suppose, on the other hand, that you as an agent did something to hurt the receiver, such as steal his car. I as the spectator would then sympathetically experience the receiver’s pain and thereby pronounce your motivating character trait to be a vice, as opposed to a virtue.

In short, that is Hume’s overall theory. There are, though, some important details that should also be mentioned. First, it is tricky to determine whether an agent’s motivating character trait is natural or artificial, and Hume decides this one virtue at a time. For Hume, the natural virtues include benevolence, meekness, charity, and generosity. By contrast, the artificial virtues include justice, keeping promises, allegiance and chastity. Contrary to what one might expect, Hume classifies the key virtues that are necessary for a well-ordered state as artificial, and he classifies only the more supererogatory virtues as natural. Hume’s critics were quick to point out this paradox. Second, to spark a feeling of moral approval, the spectator does not have to actually witness the effect of an agent’s action upon a receiver. The spectator might simply hear about it, or the spectator might even simply invent an entire scenario and think about the possible effects of hypothetical actions. This happens when we have moral reactions when reading works of fiction: “a very play or romance may afford us instances of this pleasure, which virtue conveys to us; and pain, which arises from vices” (Treatise,

Third, although the agent, receiver, and spectator have psychologically distinct roles, in some situations a single person may perform more than one of these roles. For example, if I as an agent donate to charity, as a spectator to my own action I can also sympathize with the effect of my donation on the receiver. Finally, given various combinations of spectators and receivers, Hume concludes that there are four irreducible categories of qualities that exhaustively constitute moral virtue: (1) qualities useful to others, which include benevolence, meekness, charity, justice, fidelity and veracity; (2) qualities useful to oneself, which include industry, perseverance, and patience; (3) qualities immediately agreeable to others, which include wit, eloquence and cleanliness; and (4) qualities immediately agreeable to oneself, which include good humor, self-esteem and pride. For Hume, most morally significant qualities and actions seem to fall into more than one of these categories. When Hume spoke about an agent’s “useful” consequences, he often used the word “utility” as a synonym. This is particularly so in the Enquiry Concerning the Principles of Morals where the term “utility” appears over 50 times. Moral theorists after Hume thus depicted his moral theory as the “theory of utility”—namely, that morality involves assessing the pleasing and painful consequences of actions on the receiver. It is this concept and terminology that inspired classic utilitarian philosophers, such as Jeremy Bentham (1748–1832).

8. Aesthetic, Political, and Economic Theory


Hume wrote two influential essays on the subject of aesthetic theory. In “Of Tragedy” (1757) he discusses the psychological reasons why we enjoy observing depictions of tragic events in theatrical production. He argues that “the energy of expression, the power of numbers, and the charm of imitation” convey the sense of pleasure. He particularly stresses the technical artistry involved when an artistic work imitates the original. In “Of the Standard of Taste” (1757) he argues that there is a uniform sense of artistic judgment in human nature, similar to our uniform sense of moral judgment. Specific objects consistently trigger feelings of beauty within us, as our human nature dictates. Just as we can refine our external senses such as our palate, we can also refine our sense of artistic beauty and thus cultivate a delicacy of taste. In spite of this uniform standard of taste, two factors create some difference in our judgments: “the one is the different humours of particular men; the other, the particular manners and opinions of our age and country.”

In political theory, Hume has both theoretical discussions on the origins of government and more informal essays on popular political controversies of his day. In his theoretical discussions, he attacks two basic notions in eighteenth-century political philosophy: the social contract and the instinctive nature of justice regarding private property. In his 1748 essay “Of the Original Contract,” he argues that political allegiance is not grounded in any social contract, but instead on our general observation that society cannot be maintained without a governmental system. He concedes that in savage times there may have been an unwritten contract among tribe members for the sake of peace and order. However, he argues, this was no permanent basis of government as social contract theorists pretend. There is nothing to transmit that original contract onwards from generation to generation, and our experience of actual political events shows that governmental authority is founded on conquest, not elections or consent. We do not even tacitly consent to a contract since many of us have no real choice about remaining in our countries: “Can we seriously say that a poor peasant or artisan has a free choice to leave his country, when he knows no foreign language or manners, and lives from day to day by the small wages which he acquires?” Political allegiance, he concludes, is ultimately based on a primary instinct of selfishness, and only through reflection will we see how we benefit from an orderly society.

Concerning private property, in both the Treatise and the Enquiry Concerning the Principles of Morals (1751), Hume in essence argues against Locke’s notion of the natural right to private property. For Hume, we have no primary instinct to recognize private property, and all conceptions of justice regarding property are founded solely on how useful the convention of property is to us. We can see how property ownership is tied to usefulness when considering scenarios concerning the availability of necessities. When necessities are in overabundance, I can take what I want any time, and there is no usefulness in my claiming any property as my own. When the opposite happens and necessities are scarce, I do not acknowledge anyone’s claim to property and take what I want from others for my own survival. Thus, “the rules of equity or justice [regarding property] depend entirely on the particular state and condition in which men are placed, and owe their origin and existence to that utility, which results to the public from their strict and regular observance” (Enquiry Concerning the Principles of Morals, 3). Further, if we closely inspect human nature, we will never find a primary instinct that inclines us to acknowledge private property. It is nothing like the primary instinct of nest building in birds. While the sense of justice regarding private property is a firmly fixed habit, it is nevertheless its usefulness to society that gives it value.

As for Hume’s informal essays on popular political controversies, several of these involve party disputes between the politically conservative Tory party that supported a strong monarchy, and the politically liberal Whig party which supported a constitutional government. Two consistent themes emerge in these essays. First, in securing peace, a monarchy with strong authority is probably better than a pure republic. Hume sides with the Tories because of their traditional support of the monarchy. Except in extreme cases, he opposes the Lockean argument offered by Whigs that justifies overthrowing political authorities when those authorities fail to protect the rights of the people. Hume notes, though, that monarchies and republics each have their strong points. Monarchies encourage the arts, and republics encourage science and trade. Hume also appreciates the mixed form of government within Great Britain, which fosters liberty of the press. The second theme in Hume’s political essays is that revolutions and civil wars principally arise from zealousness within party factions. Political moderation, he argues, is the best antidote to potentially ruinous party conflict.

In economic theory, Hume wrote influential essays on money, interest, trade, credit, and taxes. Many of these target the mercantile system and its view that a country increases its wealth by increasing the quantity of gold and silver in that country. For mercantilists, three means were commonly employed to this end: (1) capture gold, silver and raw material from other countries through colonization; (2) discourage imports through tariffs and monopolies, which keeps acquired gold and silver within one’s country’s borders; and, (3) increase exports, which brings in money from outside countries. In Great Britain, mercantile policies were instituted through the Navigation Acts, which prohibited trade between British colonies and foreign countries. These protectionist laws ultimately led to the American Revolution. The most famous of Hume’s anti-mercantilist arguments is now called Hume’s gold-flow theory, and appears in his essays “Of Money” (1752) and “Of the Balance of Trade” (1752). Contrary to mercantilists who advocated locking up money in one’s home country, Hume argued that increased money in one country automatically disperses to other countries. Suppose, for example, that Great Britain receives an influx of new money. This new money will drive up prices of labor and domestic products in Great Britain. Products in foreign countries, then, will be cheaper than in Great Britain; Britain, then, will import these products, thereby sending new money to foreign countries. Hume compares this reshuffling of wealth to the level of fluids in interconnected chambers: if I add fluid to one chamber, then, under the weight of gravity, this will disperse to the others until the level is the same in all chambers. A similar phenomenon will occur if we lose money in our home country by purchasing imports from foreign countries. As the quantity of money decreases in our home country, this will drive down the prices of labor and domestic products. Our products, then, will be cheaper than foreign products, and we will gain money through exports. On the fluid analogy, by removing fluid from one chamber, more fluid is drawn in from surrounding chambers.

9. History and Philosophy

Although Hume is now remembered mainly as a philosopher, in his own day he had at least as much impact as a historian. His History of England appeared in four installments between 1754 and 1762 and covers the periods of British history from most ancient times through the seventeenth-century. To his 18th and 19th century readers, he was not just another historian, but a uniquely philosophical historian who had an ability to look into the minds of historical figures and uncover the motives behind their conduct. A political theme underlying the whole History is, once again, a conflict between Tory and Whig ideology. In the Britain of Hume’s day, a major point of contention between the two parties was whether the English government was historically an absolute or limited monarchy. Tories believed that it was traditionally absolute, with governmental authority being grounded in royal prerogative. Whigs, on the other hand, believed that it was traditionally limited, with the foundation of government resting in the individual liberty of the people, as expressed in the parliamentary voice of the commons. As a historian, Hume felt that he was politically moderate, tending to see both the strengths and weaknesses in opposing viewpoints:

With regard to politics and the character of princes and great men, I think I am very moderate. My views of things are more conformable to Whig principles; my representations of persons to Tory prejudices. Nothing can so much prove that men commonly regard more persons than things, as to find that I am commonly numbered among the Tories [Hume to John Clephane, 1756].

However, to radical Whig British readers, Hume was a conservative Tory who defended royal prerogative.

Hume takes two distinct positions on the prerogative issue. From a theoretical and idealistic perspective, he favored a mixed constitution, mediating between the authority of the monarch and that of the Parliament. Discussing this issue in his 1741 Essays, he holds that we should learn “the lesson of moderation in all our political controversies.” However, from the perspective of how British history actually unfolded, he emphasized royal prerogative. And, as a “philosophical historian,” he tried to show how human nature gave rise to the tendency towards royal prerogative. In his brief autobiography, “My Own Life,” he says that he rejected the “senseless clamour” of Whig ideology, and believed “It is ridiculous to consider the English constitution before that period [of the Stuart Monarchs] as a regular plan of liberty.” Gilbert Stuart best encapsulated Hume’s historical stance on the prerogative issue: “his history, from its beginning to its conclusion, is chiefly to be regarded as a plausible defence of prerogative” (A View of Society in Europe, 1778, 2.1.1). In short, Hume’s Tory narrative is this. As early as the Anglo Saxon period, the commons did not participate in the king’s advisory council. The Witenagemot, for example, was only a council of nobles and bishops, which the king could listen to or ignore as he saw fit. Throughout the succeeding centuries, England’s great kings were those who exercised absolute rule, and took advantage of prerogative courts such as the Star Chamber. Elizabeth—England’s most beloved monarch—was in fact a tyrant, and her reign was much like that of a Turkish sultan. Charles I—a largely virtuous man—tried to follow in her footsteps as a strong monarch. After a few minor lapses in judgment, and a few too many concessions to Catholics, Protestant zealots rose up against him, and he was ultimately executed. To avoid over-characterizing royal prerogative, Hume occasionally condemns arbitrary actions of monarchs and praises efforts for preserving liberty. Nevertheless, Whig critics like Gilbert Stuart argued that Hume’s emphasis was decisively in favor of prerogative.

There is an irony to Hume’s preference for prerogative over civil liberty. His philosophical writings were among the most controversial pieces of literature of the time, and would have been impossible to publish if Britain was not a friend to liberty. Although Hume was certainly no enemy to liberty, he believed that it was best achieved through moderation rather than Whig radicalism. He writes, “If any other rule than established practice be followed, factions and dissentions must multiply without end” (History, Appendix 3). To Hume’s way of thinking, the loudest voices favoring liberty were Calvinistic religious fanatics who accomplished little more than dissention. A strong, centralized and moderating force was the best way to avoid factious disruption from the start.

10. References and Further Reading

a. Recent Editions of Hume’s Writings

There are many published editions of Hume’s writings, the best of which are as follows (listed chronologically).

  • The Philosophical Works of David Hume (1874-1875), ed. T.H. Green and T.H. Grose.
    • This four-volume set was the definitive edition of the late nineteenth century, and is the text source of many individually published books on Hume. It does not include the History. Electronic versions of this edition are freely available on the internet.
  • Hume’s Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion (1935), ed., Norman Kemp Smith.
    • This is the definitive edition of this work, and contains a ground-breaking introductory essay.
  • Enquiries (Oxford, 1975) ed. L.A. Selby-Bigge and P.H. Nidditch.
    • This contains Hume’s two Enquiries, and was the definitive edition of these works in the late twentieth-century.
  • Treatise of Human Nature (Oxford, 1978), ed. L.A. Selby-Bigge and P.H. Nidditch.
    • This was the definitive edition of this work in the late twentieth-century.
  • History of England (Liberty Classics, 1983).
    • This is the definitive edition of this work.
  • Essays, Moral, Political and Literary (Liberty Classics, 1987), ed. E.F. Miller.
    • This is the definitive edition of this work.
  • The Clarendon Edition of the Works of David Hume (1998-ongoing), ed. Tom L. Beauchamp, Mark Box, David Fate Norton, Mary Norton, M.A. Stewart.
    • This is a carefully-researched critical edition of Hume’s philosophical works, and supersedes all previous editions. Volumes on Hume’s Essays and the Dialogues are forthcoming; it does not include Hume’s History.

b. Chronological List of Hume’s Publications

  • A Treatise of Human Nature: Being an Attempt to Introduce the Experimental Method of Reasoning into Moral Subjects (1739-40).
    • This was published anonymously in three volumes: Vol. I. Of the Understanding; Vol. II. Of the Passions. Vol. III. Of Morals. This is Hume’s principle philosophical work, the central notions of which were rewritten more popularly in Philosophical Essays Concerning Human Understanding (1748) and An Enquiry Concerning the Principles of Morals (1751).
  • An Abstract of a Book lately Published;  entituled, A Treatise of Human Nature, &c. Wherein the chief Argument  of that Book is farther Illustrated and Explained (1740).
    • This is a sixteen page pamphlet, published anonymously as an effort to bring attention to the Treatise.
  • Essays, Moral and Political (1741-1742).
    • This was published anonymously in two volumes in 1741 and 1742 respectively. In subsequent editions some essays were dropped and others added; the collection was eventually combined with his Political Discourses (1752) and retitled Essays, Moral, Political and Literary in Hume’s collection of philosophical works, Essays and Treatises on Several Subjects (1753).
  • A Letter from a Gentleman to his Friend in Edinburgh: Containing Some Observations on a Specimen of the Principles concerning Religion and Morality, said to be maintain’d in a Book lately publish’d, intituled, A Treatise of Human Nature, &c (1745).
    • This thirty-four page pamphlet was published anonymously and was prompted by Hume’s candidacy for the Chair of Moral Philosophy at the University of Edinburgh. The pamphlet responds to criticisms regarding the Treatise.
  • Philosophical Essays Concerning Human Understanding. By the Author of the Essays Moral and Political (1748).
    • This was published anonymously and later retitled Enquiry Concerning Human Understanding. It is a popularized version of key themes that appear mainly in the Treatise, Book 1.
  • A True Account of the Behaviour and conduct of Archibald Stewart, Esq; late Lord Provost of Edinburgh. In a letter to a Friend (1748).
    • This fifty-one page pamphlet was published anonymously as a defense of Archibald Stewart, Lord Provost of Edinburgh, surrounding a political controversy.
  • An Enquiry Concerning the Principles of Morals. By David Hume, Esq. (1751).
    • This is a popularized version of key themes that appear mainly in the Treatise, Book 3.
  • The Petition of the Grave and Venerable Bellmen (or Sextons) of the Church of Scotland (1751).
    • This was published anonymously and involved the Church of Scotland’s efforts to increase their stipends.
  • Political discourses. By David Hume Esq. (1752).
    • This is a collection of essays on economic and political subjects, which was eventually combined with his Essays Moral and Political (1741-1742) and retitled Essays, Moral, Political and Literary in Hume’s collection of philosophical works, Essays and Treatises on Several Subjects (1753).
  • Scotticisms (1752).
    • This six page pamphlet was published anonymously, and lists Scottish idioms.
  • The History of England, from the Invasion of Julius Cæsar to  the  Revolution in 1688 (1754-1762).
    • This was published in four installments: (a) The history of Great Britain. Vol. I.  Containing the reigns of James I. and Charles I. By David Hume, Esq. (1754); (b) The history of Great Britain. Vol. II.  Containing the Commonwealth, and the reigns of Charles II. and James  II. By David Hume, Esq. (1757); (c) The history of England, under the House of Tudor Comprehending the reigns of K. Henry VII. K. Henry VIII. K. Edward VI. Q. Mary, and Q. Elizabeth. . . .  By David Hume,  Esq (1759); (d) The history of England, from the invasion of Julius Cæsar to the  accession of Henry VII. . . .  By David Hume, Esq. (1762).
  • Essays and Treatises on Several Subjects. By David Hume, Esq; In four  volumes (1753).
    • This is Hume’s handpicked collection of philosophical works, which includes (a) Essays, Moral and Political, (b) Philosophical Essays concerning Human Understanding, (c) An Enquiry Concerning the Principles of Morals, and (d) Political Discourses. Essays from Four Dissertations (1757) were added to later editions. The collection does not include the Treatise.
  • Four Dissertations. I. The Natural History of Religion. II. Of the  Passions. III. Of Tragedy. IV. Of the Standard of Taste. By David Hume,  esq. (1757).
    • This volume was originally to include “Of Suicide” and “Of the Immortality of the Soul,” which were removed at the last minute and appeared separately in 1783 in an unauthorized posthumous edition. The four essays in Four Dissertations were later added to various sections of Essays and Treatises on Several Subjects.
  • Letter to Critical Review, April 1759, Vol. 7. pp. 323-334.
    • This is a defense of William Wilkie’s epic poem Epigoniad.
  • Exposé succinct de la contestation qui s’est élevée entre M. Hume et M. Rousseau, avec les pieces justificatives (1766).
    • This is a pamphlet containing letters between Hume and Rousseau, published anonymously, translated from English by J.B.A. Suard. The pamphlet was translated back to English in A Concise and Genuine account of the Dispute between Mr. Hume and Mr. Rousseau: with the Letters that Passed Between them during their Controversy (1766).
  • Advertisement to Baron Manstein’s Memoirs of Russia, Historical, Political and Military, from MDCXXVII, to MDCXLIV (1770).
    • This is an opening advertisement by Hume to Manstein’s work.
  • The Life of David Hume, Esq. Written by Himself (1777). This contains “My Own Life” and “Letter from Adam Smith, LL.D. to William Strahan, Esq.”
  • Dialogues Concerning Natural religion. By David Hume, Esq. (1779).
    • This is a posthumous edition from Hume’s unpublished manuscript, and contains his most detailed attack on natural religion.
  • Essays on Suicide, and the Immortality of the Soul,  ascribed to the late David Hume, Esq. Never before Published. With  Remarks, intended as an Antidote to the Poison contained in these  Performances, by the Editor. To which is added, Two Letters on Suicide,  from Rosseau’s [sic] Eloisa (1783).
    • This is an unauthorized publication of the two essays that were originally associated with Four Dissertations.

c. Biographies, Letters, Manuscripts

  • Greig, J.Y.T. Letters of David Hume (1932), two volumes.
    • This is the best collection of Hume’s letters (along with the supplementary volume by Klibansky below).
  • Greig, J.Y.T.; Beynon, Harold, eds. “Calendar of Hume MSS. in the possession of the Royal Society,” in Proceedings of the Royal Society of Edinburgh, 1931–1932, Vol. 52, pp. 1–138.
    • This is a detailed list of the Hume manuscripts with a contents summary of each item, and has been published separately in book.
  • Klibansky, Raymond; Mossner, Ernest. New Letters of David Hume (1954).
    • This volume of letters is a supplement to Greig’s two volume collection above.
  • Mossner, E.C.  The Life of David Hume (Oxford, 1980).
    • This is the best biography of Hume.
  • National Library of Scotland (MS no. 23151–23163).
    • This manuscript deposit contains thirteen large volumes assembled from papers collected by Hume’s family after his death. It includes around 150 letters by Hume, 525 letters to him, and several manuscripts of published and unpublished works, most importantly the manuscript of his Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion.

d. Bibliographies

  • “The Hume Literature,” Hume Studies, 1977-present.
    • Each year Hume Studies publishes an annual bibliographical update; these bibliographies exclude articles that appear in Hume Studies itself.
  • “An Index of Hume Studies: 1975-1993.” Hume Studies 19.2 (1993).
    • This is a bibliographical index of articles that have appeared in Hume Studies since the journal’s inception until 1993.
  • Fieser, James. A Bibliography of Hume’s Writings and Early Responses (2005).
    • This is a bibliography of Hume’s writings and eighteenth and nineteenth-century responses. It is freely available on the internet.
  • Hall, Rolland. Fifty Years of Hume Scholarship: A Bibliographic Guide (1978).
    • This bibliography covers from 1925 through 1976, and is continued by the annual Hume bibliographies in Hume Studies.
  • Jessop, Thomas Edmund. A bibliography of David Hume and of Scottish philosophy from Francis Hutcheson to Lord Balfour (1938).
    • This is the first published scholarly bibliographical work on Hume, early responses to Hume, and other Scottish philosophers.
  • Tweyman, Stanley. Secondary Sources on the Philosophy of David Hume: A David Hume Bibliography in Two Volumes, 1741-2005 (2006).

e. Works on Hume

The secondary literature on Hume is voluminous. Below are a few works that cover all aspects of Hume’s philosophy. For works on specific aspects of Hume, such as his epistemology, see other IEP articles on Hume.

  • Ayer, A.J. Hume (1980).
    • This is a short but informative introduction by a great twentieth-century philosopher who sees himself as following in the Humean tradition.
  • Blackburn, Simon. How to Read Hume (2008).
    • This is a concise work on various aspects of Hume’s philosophy.
  • Fieser, James. Early Responses to Hume’s Writings (London: Continuum, 2005), 10 volumes.
    • This contains the principal eighteenth and nineteenth-century criticisms of Hume.
  • Kemp Smith, Norman. The Philosophy of David Hume (1941).
    • This groundbreaking book set a new direction for Hume scholarship.
  • Hume Studies, 1977-present.
    • This journal is devoted to Hume scholarship, and most of the volumes are freely accessible on the Hume Studies web site.
  • Jones, Peter, ed. The Reception of David Hume in Europe. London, New York: Thoemmes Continuum, 2005.
    • This work contains chapters by different writers on Hume’s impact in different European countries.
  • Norton, David Fate; Taylor, Jacqueline. The Cambridge Companion to Hume (2008).
    • This contains essays by different writers on various aspects of Hume’s philosophy.
  • Stroud, Barry. Hume (1981).
    • This is an influential analytic discussion of various problems that arise within Hume’s philosophy.

Author Information

James Fieser
University of Tennessee at Martin
U. S. A.

Plato: Phaedo

The Phaedo is one of the most widely read dialogues written by the ancient Greek philosopher Plato.  It claims to recount the events and conversations that occurred on the day that Plato’s teacher, Socrates (469-399 B.C.E.), was put to death by the state of Athens.  It is the final episode in the series of dialogues recounting Socrates’ trial and death.  The earlier Euthyphro dialogue portrayed Socrates in discussion outside the court where he was to be prosecuted on charges of impiety and corrupting the youth; the Apology described his defense before the Athenian jury; and the Crito described a conversation during his subsequent imprisonment.  The Phaedo now brings things to a close by describing the moments in the prison cell leading up to Socrates’ death from poisoning by use of hemlock.

Among these “trial and death” dialogues, the Phaedo is unique in that it presents Plato’s own metaphysical, psychological, and epistemological views; thus it belongs to Plato’s middle period rather than with his earlier works detailing Socrates’ conversations regarding ethics.  Known to ancient commentators by the title On the Soul, the dialogue presents no less than four arguments for the soul’s immortality.  It also contains discussions of Plato’s doctrine of knowledge as recollection, his account of the soul’s relationship to the body, and his views about causality and scientific explanation.  Most importantly of all, Plato sets forth his most distinctive philosophical theory—the theory of Forms—for what is arguably the first time. So, the Phaedo merges Plato’s own philosophical worldview with an enduring portrait of Socrates in the hours leading up to his death.

Table of Contents

  1. The Place of the Phaedo within Plato’s works
  2. Drama and Doctrine
  3. Outline of the Dialogue
    1. The Philosopher and Death (59c-69e)
    2. Three Arguments for the Soul’s Immortality (69e-84b)
      1. The Cyclical Argument (70c-72e)
      2. The Argument from Recollection (72e-78b)
      3. The Affinity Argument (78b-84b)
    3. Objections from Simmias and Cebes, and Socrates’ Response (84c-107b)
      1. The Objections (85c-88c)
      2. Interlude on Misology (89b-91c)
      3. Response to Simmias (91e-95a)
      4. Response to Cebes (95a-107b)
        1. Socrates’ Intellectual History (96a-102a)
        2. The Final Argument (102b-107b)
    4. The Myth about the Afterlife (107c-115a)
    5. Socrates’ Death (115a-118a)
  4. References and Further Reading
    1. General Commentaries
    2. The Philosopher and Death (59c-69e)
    3. Three Arguments for the Soul’s Immortality (69e-84b)
    4. Objections from Simmias and Cebes, and Socrates’ Response (84c-107b)
    5. The Myth about the Afterlife (107c-115a)
    6. Socrates’ Death (115a-118a)

1. The Place of the Phaedo within Plato’s works

Plato wrote approximately thirty dialogues.  The Phaedo is usually placed at the beginning of his “middle” period, which contains his own distinctive views about the nature of knowledge, reality, and the soul, as well as the implications of these views for human ethical and political life.  Its middle-period classification puts it after “early” dialogues such as the Apology, Euthyphro, Crito, Protagoras, and others which present Socrates’ search—usually inconclusive—for ethical definitions, and before “late” dialogues like the Parmenides, Theaetetus, Sophist, and Statesman.  Within the middle dialogues, it is uncontroversial that the Phaedo was written before the Republic, and most scholars think it belongs before the Symposium as well.  Thus, in addition to being an account of what Socrates said and did on the day he died, the Phaedo contains what is probably Plato’s first overall statement of his own philosophy.  His most famous theory, the theory of Forms, is presented in four different places in the dialogue.

2. Drama and Doctrine

In addition to its central role in conveying Plato’s philosophy, the Phaedo is widely agreed to be a masterpiece of ancient Greek literature. Besides philosophical argumentation, it contains a narrative framing device that resembles the chorus in Greek tragedy, references to the Greek myth of Theseus and the fables of Aesop, Plato’s own original myth about the afterlife, and in its opening and closing pages, a moving portrait of Socrates in the hours leading up to his death.  Plato draws attention (at 59b) to the fact that he himself was not present during the events retold, suggesting that he wants the dialogue to be seen as work of fiction.

Contemporary commentators have struggled to put together the dialogue’s dramatic components with its lengthy sections of philosophical argumentation—most importantly, with the four arguments for the soul’s immortality, which tend to strike even Plato’s charitable interpreters as being in need of further defense.  (Socrates himself challenges his listeners to provide such defense at 84c-d.)  How seriously does Plato take these arguments, and what does the surrounding context contribute to our understanding of them?  While this article will concentrate on the philosophical aspects of the Phaedo, readers are advised to pay close attention to the interwoven dramatic features as well.

3. Outline of the Dialogue

The dialogue revolves around the topic of death and immortality: how the philosopher is supposed to relate to death, and what we can expect to happen to our souls after we die.  The text can be divided, rather unevenly, into five sections:

(1) an initial discussion of the philosopher and death (59c-69e)

(2) three arguments for the soul’s immortality (69e-84b)

(3) some objections to these arguments from Socrates’ interlocutors and his response, which includes a fourth argument (84c-107b)

(4) a myth about the afterlife (107c-115a)

(5) a description of the final moments of Socrates’ life (115a-118a)

The dialogue commences with a conversation (57a-59c) between two characters, Echecrates and Phaedo, occurring sometime after Socrates’ death in the Greek city of Phlius.  The former asks the latter, who was present on that day, to recount what took place.  Phaedo begins by explaining why some time had elapsed between Socrates’ trial and his execution: the Athenians had sent their annual religious mission to Delos the day before the trial, and executions are forbidden until the mission returns.  He also lists the friends who were present and describes their mood as “an unaccustomed mixture of pleasure and pain,” since Socrates appeared happy and without fear but his friends knew that he was going to die.  He agrees to tell the whole story from the beginning; within this story the main interlocutors are Socrates, Simmias, and Cebes.  Some commentators on the dialogue have taken the latter two characters to be followers of the philosopher Pythagoras (570-490 B.C).

a. The Philosopher and Death (59c-69e)

Socrates’ friends learn that he will die on the present day, since the mission from Delos has returned.  They go in to the prison to find Socrates with his wife Xanthippe and their baby, who are then sent away.  Socrates, rubbing the place on his leg where his just removed bonds had been, remarks on how strange it is that a man cannot have both pleasure and pain at the same time, yet when he pursues and catches one, he is sure to meet with the other as well.  Cebes asks Socrates about the poetry he is said to have begun writing, since Evenus (a Sophist teacher, not present) was wondering about this.  Socrates relates how certain dreams have caused him to do so, and says that he is presently putting Aesop’s fables into verse.  He then asks Cebes to convey to Evenus his farewell, and to tell him that—even though it would be wrong to take his own life—he, like any philosopher, should be prepared to follow Socrates to his death.

Here the conversation turns toward an examination of the philosopher’s attitude toward death.  The discussion starts with the question of suicide.  If philosophers are so willing to die, asks Cebes, why is it wrong for them to kill themselves?  Socrates’ initial answer is that the gods are our guardians, and that they will be angry if one of their possessions kills itself without permission.  As Cebes and Simmias immediately point out, however, this appears to contradict his earlier claim that the philosopher should be willing to die: for what truly wise man would want to leave the service of the best of all masters, the gods?

In reply to their objection, Socrates offers to “make a defense” of his view, as if he were in court, and submits that he hopes this defense will be more convincing to them than it was to the jury.  (He is referring here, of course, to his defense at his trial, which is recounted in Plato’s Apology.) The thesis to be supported is a generalized version of his earlier advice to Evenus: that “the one aim of those who practice philosophy in the proper manner is to practice for dying and death” (64a3-4).

Socrates begins his defense of this thesis, which takes up the remainder of the present section, by defining death as the separation of body and soul.  This definition goes unchallenged by his interlocutors, as does its dualistic assumption that body and soul are two distinct entities.   (The Greek word psuchē is only roughly approximate to our word “soul”; the Greeks thought of psuchē as what makes something alive, and Aristotle talks about non-human animals and even plants as having souls in this sense.)  Granted that death is a soul/body separation, Socrates sets forth a number of reasons why philosophers are prepared for such an event.  First, the true philosopher despises bodily pleasures such as food, drink, and sex, so he more than anyone else wants to free himself from his body (64d-65a).  Additionally, since the bodily senses are inaccurate and deceptive, the philosopher’s search for knowledge is most successful when the soul is “most by itself.”

The latter point holds especially for the objects of philosophical knowledge that Plato later on in the dialogue (103e) refers to as “Forms.”  Here Forms are mentioned for what is perhaps the first time in Plato’s dialogues: the Just itself, the Beautiful, and the Good; Bigness, Health, and Strength; and “in a word, the reality of all other things, that which each of them essentially is” (65d).  They are best approached not by sense perception but by pure thought alone. These entities are granted again without argument by Simmias and Cebes, and are discussed in more detail later. .

All told, then, the body is a constant impediment to philosophers in their search for truth: “It fills us with wants, desires, fears, all sorts of illusions and much nonsense, so that, as it is said, in truth and in fact no thought of any kind ever comes to us from the body” (66c).  To have pure knowledge, therefore, philosophers must escape from the influence of the body as much as is possible in this life. Philosophy itself is, in fact, a kind of “training for dying” (67e), a purification of the philosopher’s soul from its bodily attachment.

Thus, Socrates concludes, it would be unreasonable for a philosopher to fear death, since upon dying he is most likely to obtain the wisdom which he has been seeking his whole life.  Both the philosopher’s courage in the face of death and his moderation with respect to bodily pleasures which result from the pursuit of wisdom stand in stark contrast to the courage and moderation practiced by ordinary people.  (Wisdom, courage, and moderation are key virtues in Plato’s writings, and are included in his definition of justice in the Republic.) Ordinary people are only brave in regard to some things because they fear even worse things happening, and only moderate in relation to some pleasures because they want to be immoderate with respect to others.  But this is only “an illusory appearance of virtue”—for as it happens, “moderation and courage and justice are a purging away of all such things, and wisdom itself is a kind of cleansing or purification” (69b-c).  Since Socrates counts himself among these philosophers, why wouldn’t he be prepared to meet death?  Thus ends his defense.

b. Three Arguments for the Soul’s Immortality (69e-84b)

But what about those, says Cebes, who believe that the soul is destroyed when a person dies?  To persuade them that it continues to exist on its own will require some compelling argument.  Readers should note several important features of Cebes’ brief objection (70a-b).  First, he presents the belief in the immortality of the soul as an uncommon belief (“men find it hard to believe . . .”).  Secondly, he identifies two things which need to be demonstrated in order to convince those who are skeptical: (a) that the soul continues to exist after a person’s death, and (b) that it still possesses intelligence.  The first argument that Socrates deploys appears to be intended to respond to (a), and the second to (b).

i. The Cyclical Argument (70c-72e)

Socrates mentions an ancient theory holding that just as the souls of the dead in the underworld come from those living in this world, the living souls come back from those of the dead (70c-d).  He uses this theory as the inspiration for his first argument, which may be reconstructed as follows:

1. All things come to be from their opposite states: for example, something that comes to be “larger” must necessarily have been “smaller” before (70e-71a).

2. Between every pair of opposite states there are two opposite processes: for example, between the pair “smaller” and “larger” there are the processes “increase” and “decrease” (71b).

3. If the two opposite processes did not balance each other out, everything would eventually be in the same state: for example, if increase did not balance out decrease, everything would keep becoming smaller and smaller (72b).

4.  Since “being alive” and “being dead” are opposite states, and “dying” and “coming-to-life” are the two opposite processes between these states, coming-to-life must balance out dying (71c-e).

5. Therefore, everything that dies must come back to life again (72a).

A main question that arises in regard to this argument is what Socrates means by “opposites.” We can see at least two different ways in which this term is used in reference to the opposed states he mentions.  In a first sense, it is used for “comparatives” such as larger and smaller (and also the pairs weaker/stronger and swifter/slower at 71a), opposites which admit of various degrees and which even may be present in the same object at once (on this latter point, see 102b-c).  However, Socrates also refers to “being alive” and “being dead” as opposites—but this pair is rather different from comparative states such as larger and smaller, since something can’t be deader, but only dead.  Being alive and being dead are what logicians call “contraries” (as opposed to “contradictories,” such as “alive” and “not-alive,” which exclude any third possibility).  With this terminology in mind, some contemporary commentators have maintained that the argument relies on covertly shifting between these different kinds of opposites.

Clever readers may notice other apparent difficulties as well.  Does the principle about balance in (3), for instance, necessarily apply to living things?  Couldn’t all life simply cease to exist at some point, without returning?  Moreover, how does Plato account for adding new living souls to the human population?  While these questions are perhaps not unanswerable from the point of view of the present argument, we should keep in mind that Socrates has several arguments remaining, and he later suggests that this first one should be seen as complementing the second (77c-d).

ii. The Argument from Recollection (72e-78b)

Cebes mentions that the soul’s immortality also is supported by Socrates’ theory that learning is “recollection” (a theory which is, by most accounts, distinctively Platonic, and one that plays a role in his dialogues Meno and Phaedrus as well).  As evidence of this theory he mentions instances in which people can “recollect” answers to questions they did not previously appear to possess when this knowledge is elicited from them using the proper methods. This is likely a reference to the Meno (82b ff.), where Socrates elicits knowledge about basic geometry from a slave-boy by asking the latter a series of questions to guide him in the right direction. Asked by Simmias to elaborate further upon this doctrine, Socrates explains that recollection occurs “when a man sees or hears or in some other way perceives one thing and not only knows that thing but also thinks of another thing of which the knowledge is not the same but different . . .” (73c).  For example, when a lover sees his beloved’s lyre, the image of his beloved comes into his mind as well, even though the lyre and the beloved are two distinct things.

Based on this theory, Socrates now commences a second proof for the soul’s immortality—one which is referred to with approval in later passages in the dialogue (77a-b, 87a, 91e-92a, and 92d-e). The argument may be reconstructed as follows:

1. Things in the world which appear to be equal in measurement are in fact deficient in the equality they possess (74b, d-e).

2. Therefore, they are not the same as true equality, that is, “the Equal itself” (74c).

3. When we see the deficiency of the examples of equality, it helps us to think of, or “recollect,” the Equal itself (74c-d).

4. In order to do this, we must have had some prior knowledge of the Equal itself (74d-e).

5. Since this knowledge does not come from sense-perception, we must have acquired it before we acquired sense-perception, that is, before we were born (75b ff.).

6. Therefore, our souls must have existed before we were born. (76d-e)

With regard to premise (1), in what respect are this-worldly instances of equality deficient?  Socrates mentions that two apparently equal sticks, for example, “fall short” of true equality and are thus “inferior” to it (74e).  Why?  His reasoning at 74b8-9—that the sticks “sometimes, while remaining the same, appear to one to be equal and another to be unequal”—is notoriously ambiguous, and has been the subject of much scrutiny.  He could mean that the sticks may appear as equal or unequal to different observers, or perhaps they appear as equal when measured against one thing but not another.  In any case, the notion that the sensible world is imperfect is a standard view of the middle dialogues (see Republic 479b-c for a similar example), and  is emphasized further in his next argument.

By “true equality” and “the Equal itself” in premises (2)-(4), Socrates is referring to the Form of Equality.  It is this entity with respect to which the sensible instances of equality fall short—and indeed, Socrates says that the Form is “something else beyond all these.”  His brief argument at 74a-c that true equality is something altogether distinct from any visible instances of equality is of considerable interest, since it is one of few places in the middle dialogues where he makes an explicit argument for why there must be Forms. The conclusion of the second argument for the soul’s immortality extends what has been said about equality to other Forms as well: “If those realities we are always talking about exist, the Beautiful and the Good and all that kind of reality, and we refer all the things we perceive to that reality, discovering that it existed before and is ours, and we compare these things with it, then, just as they exist, so our soul must exist before we are born” (76d-e).  The process of recollection is initiated not just when we see imperfectly equal things, then, but when we see things that appear to be beautiful or good as well; experience of all such things inspires us to recollect the relevant Forms.  Moreover, if these Forms are never available to us in our sensory experience, we must have learned them even before we were capable of having such experience.

Simmias agrees with the argument so far, but says that this still does not prove that our souls exist after death, but only before birth.  This difficulty, Socrates suggests, can be resolved by combining the present argument with the one from opposites: the soul comes to life from out of death, so it cannot avoid existing after death as well.  He does not elaborate on this suggestion, however, and instead proceeds to offer a third argument.

iii. The Affinity Argument (78b-84b)

The third argument for the soul’s immortality is referred to by commentators as the “affinity argument,” since it turns on the idea that the soul has a likeness to a higher level of reality:

1. There are two kinds of existences: (a) the visible world that we perceive with our senses, which is human, mortal, composite, unintelligible, and always changing, and (b) the invisible world of Forms that we can access solely with our minds, which is divine, deathless, intelligible, non-composite, and always the same (78c-79a, 80b).

2. The soul is more like world (b), whereas the body is more like world (a) (79b-e).

3. Therefore, supposing it has been freed of bodily influence through philosophical training, the soul is most likely to make its way to world (b) when the body dies (80d-81a).  (If, however, the soul is polluted by bodily influence, it likely will stay bound to world (a) upon death (81b-82b).)

Note that this argument is intended to establish only the probability of the soul’s continued existence after the death of the body—“what kind of thing,” Socrates asks at the outset, “is likely to be scattered [after the death of the body]?” (78b; my italics)  Further, premise (2) appears to rest on an analogy between the soul and body and the two kinds of realities mentioned in (1), a style of argument that Simmias will criticize later (85e ff.).  Indeed, since Plato himself appends several pages of objections by Socrates’ interlocutors to this argument, one might wonder how authoritative he takes it to be.

Yet Socrates’ reasoning about the soul at 78c-79a states an important feature of Plato’s middle period metaphysics, sometimes referred to as his “two-world theory.”  In this picture of reality, the world perceived by the senses is set against the world of Forms, with each world being populated by fundamentally different kinds of entities:

The World of the Senses The World of Forms
Composites (that is, things with parts) Non-composites
Things that never remain the same from one moment to the next Things that always remain the same and don’t tolerate any change
Any particular thing that is equal, beautiful, and so forth The Equal, the Beautiful, and what each thing is in itself
That which is visible That which is grasped by the mind and invisible

Since the body is like one world and the soul like the other, it would be strange to think that even though the body lasts for some time after a person’s death, the soul immediately dissolves and exists no further.  Given the respective affinities of the body and soul, Socrates spends the rest of the argument (roughly 80d-84b) expanding on the earlier point (from his “defense”) that philosophers should focus on the latter. This section has some similarities to the myth about the afterlife, which he narrates near the dialogue’s end; note that some of the details of the account here of what happens after death are characterized as merely “likely.” A soul which is purified of bodily things, Socrates says, will make its way to the divine when the body dies, whereas an impure soul retains its share in the visible after death, becoming a wandering phantom.  Of the impure souls, those who have been immoderate will later become donkeys or similar animals, the unjust will become wolves or hawks, those with only ordinary non-philosophical virtue will become social creatures such as bees or ants.

The philosopher, on the other hand, will join the company of the gods.  For philosophy brings deliverance from bodily imprisonment, persuading the soul “to trust only itself and whatever reality, existing by itself, the soul by itself understands, and not to consider as true whatever it examines by other means, for this is different in different circumstances and is sensible and visible, whereas what the soul itself sees is intelligible and indivisible” (83a6-b4).  The philosopher thus avoids the “greatest and most extreme evil” that comes from the senses: that of violent pleasures and pains which deceive one into thinking that what causes them is genuine.  Hence, after death, his soul will join with that to which it is akin, namely, the divine.

c. Objections from Simmias and Cebes, and Socrates’ Response (84c-107b)

After a long silence, Socrates tells Simmias and Cebes not to worry about objecting to any of what he has just said.  For he, like the swan that sings beautifully before it dies, is dedicated to the service of Apollo, and thus filled with a gift of prophecy that makes him hopeful for what death will bring.

i. The Objections (85c-88c)

Simmias prefaces his objection by making a remark about methodology.  While certainty, he says, is either impossible or difficult,  it would show a weak spirit not to make a complete investigation.  If at the end of this investigation one fails to find the truth, one should adopt the best theory and cling to it like a raft, either until one dies or comes upon something sturdier.

This being said, he proceeds to challenge Socrates’ third argument.  For one might put forth a similar argument which claims that the soul is like a harmony and the body is like a lyre and its strings.  In fact, Simmias claims that “we really do suppose the soul to be something of this kind,” that is, a harmony or proper mixture of bodily elements like the hot and cold or dry and moist (86b-c).  (Some commentators think  the “we” here refers to followers of Pythagoras.)  But even though a musical harmony is invisible and akin to the divine, it will cease to exist when the lyre is destroyed.  Following the soul-as-harmony thesis, the same would be true of the soul when the body dies.

Next Socrates asks if Cebes has any objections.  The latter says that he is convinced by Socrates’ argument that the soul exists before birth, but still doubts whether it continues to exist after death.   In support of his doubt, he invokes a metaphor of his own.  Suppose someone were to say that since a man lasts longer than his cloak, it follows that if the cloak is still there the man must be there too.  We would certainly think this statement was nonsense. (He appears to be refering to Socrates’ argument at 80c-e here.)  Just as a man might wear out many cloaks before he dies, the soul might use up many bodies before it dies.  So even supposing everything else is granted, if “one does not further agree that the soul is not damaged by its many births and is not, in the end, altogether destroyed in one of those deaths, he might say that no one knows which death and dissolution of the body brings about the destruction of the soul, since not one of us can be aware of this” (88a-b).  In light of this uncertainty, one should always face death with fear.

ii. Interlude on Misology (89b-91c)

After a short exchange in the meta-dialogue in which Phaedo and Echecrates praise Socrates’ pleasant attitude throughout this discussion, Socrates begins his response with a warning that they not become misologues.  Misology, he says, arises in much the same way that misanthropy does: when someone with little experience puts his trust in another person, but later finds him to be unreliable, his first reaction is to blame this on the depraved nature of people in general.  If he had more knowledge and experience, however, he would not be so quick to make this leap, for he would realize that most people fall somewhere in between the extremes of good and bad, and he merely happened to encounter someone at one end of the spectrum.  A similar caution applies to arguments.  If someone thinks a particular argument is sound, but later finds out that it is not, his first inclination will be to think that all arguments are unsound; yet instead of blaming arguments in general and coming to hate reasonable discussion, we should blame our own lack of skill and experience.

iii. Response to Simmias (91e-95a)

Socrates then puts forth three counter-arguments to Simmias’ objection.  To begin, he gets both Simmias and Cebes to agree that the theory of recollection is true.  But if this is so, then Simmias is not able to “harmonize” his view that the soul is a harmony dependent on the body with the recollection view that the soul exists before birth.  Simmias admits this inconsistency, and says that he in fact prefers the theory of recollection to the other view.  Nonetheless, Socrates proceeds to make two additional points.  First, if the soul is a harmony, he contends, it can have no share in the disharmony of wickedness.  But this implies that all souls are equally good.  Second, if the soul is never out of tune with its component parts (as shown at 93a), then it seems like it could never oppose these parts.  But in fact it does the opposite, “ruling over all the elements of which one says it is composed, opposing nearly all of them throughout life, directing all their ways, inflicting harsh and painful punishment on them, . . . holding converse with desires and passions and fears, as if it were one thing talking to a different one . . .” (94c9-d5).  A passage in Homer, wherein Odysseus beats his breast and orders his heart to endure, strengthens this picture of the opposition between soul and bodily emotions.  Given these counter-arguments, Simmias agrees that the soul-as-harmony thesis cannot be correct.

iv. Response to Cebes (95a-107b)

1. Socrates’ Intellectual History (96a-102a)

After summarizing Cebes’ objection that the soul may outlast the body yet not be immortal, Socrates says that this problem requires “a thorough investigation of the cause of generation and destruction” (96a; the Greek word aitia, translated as “cause,” has the more general meaning of “explanation”).  He now proceeds to relate his own examinations into this subject, recalling in turn his youthful puzzlement about the topic, his initial attraction to a solution given by the philosopher Anaxagoras (500-428 B.C.), and finally his development of his own method of explanation involving Forms.  It is debated whether this account is meant to describe Socrates’ intellectual autobiography or Plato’s own, since the theory of Forms generally is described as the latter’s distinctive contribution.  (Some commentators have suggested that it may be neither, but instead just good storytelling on Plato’s part.)

When Socrates was young, he says, he was excited by natural science, and wanted to know the explanation of everything from how living things are nourished to how things occur in the heavens and on earth.  But then he realized that he had no ability for such investigations, since they caused him to unlearn many of the things he thought he had previously known.   He used to think, for instance, that people grew larger by various kinds of external nourishment combining with the appropriate parts of our bodies, for example, by food adding flesh to flesh.  But what is it which makes one person larger than another?   Or for that matter, which makes one and one add up to two?  It seems like it can’t be simply the two things coming near one another.   Because of puzzles like these, Socrates is now forced to admit his ignorance: “I do not any longer persuade myself that I know why a unit or anything else comes to be, or perishes or exists by the old method of investigation, and I do not accept it, but I have a confused method of my own” (97b).

This method came about as follows.  One day after his initial setbacks Socrates happened to hear of Anaxagoras’ view that Mind directs and causes all things.  He took this to mean that everything was arranged for the best.  Therefore, if one wanted to know the explanation of something, one only had to know what was best for that thing.  Suppose, for instance, that Socrates wanted to know why the heavenly bodies move the way they do.  Anaxagoras would show him how this was the best possible way for each of them to be.  And once he had taught Socrates what the best was for each thing individually, he then would explain the overall good that they all share in common.  Yet upon studying Anaxagoras further, Socrates found these expectations disappointed.  It turned out that Anaxagoras did not talk about Mind as cause at all, but rather about air and ether and other mechanistic explanations.  For Socrates, however, this sort of explanation was simply unacceptable:

To call those things causes is too absurd.  If someone said that without bones and sinews and all such things, I should not be able to do what I decided, he would be right, but surely to say that they are the cause of what I do, and not that I have chosen the best course, even though I act with my mind, is to speak very lazily and carelessly.  Imagine not being able to distinguish the real cause from that without which the cause would not be able to act as a cause. (99a-b)

Frustrated at finding a teacher who would provide a teleological explanation of these phenomena, Socrates settled for what he refers to as his “second voyage” (99d).  This new method consists in taking what seems to him to be the most convincing theory—the theory of Forms—as his basic hypothesis, and judging everything else in accordance with it.  In other words, he assumes the existence of the Beautiful, the Good, and so on, and employs them as explanations for all the other things.  If something is beautiful, for instance, the “safe answer” he now offers for what makes it such is “the presence of,” or “sharing in,” the Beautiful (100d).  Socrates does not go into any detail here about the relationship between the Form and object that shares in it, but only claims that “all beautiful things are beautiful by the Beautiful” (100d).  In regard to the phenomena that puzzled him as a young man, he offers the same answer.  What makes a big thing big, or a bigger thing bigger, is the Form Bigness.  Similarly, if one and one are said to be two, it is because they share in Twoness, whereas previously each shared in Oneness.

2. The Final Argument (102b-107b)

When Socrates has finished describing this method, both Simmias and Cebes agree that what he has said is true.  Their accord with his view is echoed in another brief interlude by Echecrates and Phaedo, in which the former says that Socrates has “made these things wonderfully clear to anyone of even the smallest intelligence,” and Phaedo adds that all those present agreed with Socrates as well.  Returning again to the prison scene, Socrates now uses this as the basis of a fourth argument that the soul is immortal.  One may reconstruct this argument as follows:

1. Nothing can become its opposite while still being itself: it either flees away or is destroyed at the approach of its opposite.  (For example, “tallness” cannot become “shortness” while still being “hot.”) (102d-103a)

2. This is true not only of opposites, but in a similar way of things that contain opposites.  (For example, “fire” and “snow” are not themselves opposites, but “fire” always brings “hot” with it, and “snow” always brings “cold” with it.  So “fire” will not become “cold” without ceasing to be “fire,” nor will “snow” become “hot” without ceasing to be “snow.”) (103c-105b)

3. The “soul” always brings “life” with it. (105c-d)

4. Therefore “soul” will never admit the opposite of “life,” that is, “death,” without ceasing to be “soul.” (105d-e)

5. But what does not admit death is also indestructible. (105e-106d)

6. Therefore, the soul is indestructible. (106e-107a)

When someone objects that premise (1) contradicts his earlier statement (at 70d-71a) about opposites arising from one another, Socrates responds that then he was speaking of things with opposite properties, whereas here is talking about the opposites themselves.  Careful readers will distinguish three different ontological items at issue in this passage:

(a) the thing (for example, Simmias) that participates in a Form (for example, that of Tallness), but can come to participate in the opposite Form (of Shortness) without thereby changing that which it is (namely, Simmias)

(b) the Form (for example, of Tallness), which cannot admit its opposite (Shortness)

(c) the Form-in-the-thing (for example, the tallness in Simmias), which cannot admit its opposite (shortness) without fleeing away of being destroyed

Premise (2) introduces another item:

(d) a kind of entity (for example, fire) that, even though it does not share the same name as a Form, always participates in that Form (for example, Hotness), and therefore always excludes the opposite Form (Coldness) wherever it (fire) exists

This new kind of entity puts Socrates beyond the “safe answer” given before (at 100d) about how a thing participates in a Form.  His new, “more sophisticated answer” is to say that what makes a body hot is not heat—the safe answer—but rather an entity such as fire.  In like manner, what makes a body sick is not sickness but fever, and what makes a number odd is not oddness but oneness (105b-c).  Premise (3) then states that the soul is this sort of entity with respect to the Form of Life.  And just as fire always brings the Form of Hotness and excludes that of Coldness, the soul will always bring the Form of Life with it and exclude its opposite.

However, one might wonder about premise (5).  Even though fire, to return to Socrates’ example, does not admit Coldness, it still may be destroyed in the presence of something cold—indeed, this was one of the alternatives mentioned in premise (1).  Similarly, might not the soul, while not admitting death, nonetheless be destroyed by its presence?  Socrates tries to block this possibility by appealing to what he takes to be a widely shared assumption, namely, that what is deathless is also indestructible: “All would agree . . . that the god, and the Form of Life itself, and anything that is deathless, are never destroyed” (107d).  For readers who do not agree that such items are deathless in the first place, however, this sort of appeal is unlikely to be acceptable.

Simmias, for his part, says he agrees with Socrates’ line of reasoning, although he admits that he may have misgivings about it later on.  Socrates says that this is only because their hypotheses need clearer examination—but upon examination they will be found convincing.

d. The Myth about the Afterlife (107c-115a)

The issue of the immortality of the soul, Socrates says, has considerable implications for morality.  If the soul is immortal, then we must worry about our souls not just in this life but for all time; if it is not, then there are no lasting consequences for those who are wicked.  But in fact, the soul is immortal, as the previous arguments have shown, and Socrates now begins to describe what happens when it journeys to the underworld after the death of the body.  The ensuing tale tells us of

(1) the judgment of the dead souls and their subsequent journey to the underworld (107d-108c)

(2) the shape of the earth and its regions (108c-113c)

(3) the punishment of the wicked and the reward of the pious philosophers (113d-114c)

Commentators commonly refer to this story as a “myth,” and Socrates himself describes it this way (using the Greek word muthos at 110b, which earlier on in the dialogue (61b) he has contrasted with logos, or “argument.”).  Readers should be aware that for the Greeks myth did not have the negative connotations it often carries today, as when we say, for instance, that something is “just a myth” or when we distinguish myth from fact.  While Plato’s relation to traditional Greek mythology is a complex one—see his critique of Homer and Hesiod in Republic Book II, for instance—he himself uses myths to bolster his doctrines not only in the Phaedo, but in dialogues such as the Gorgias, Republic, and Phaedrus as well.

At the end of his tale, Socrates says that what is important about his story is not its literal details, but rather that we “risk the belief” that “this, or something like this, is true about our souls and their dwelling places,” and repeat such a tale to ourselves as though it were an “incantation” (114d).  Doing so will keep us in good spirits as we work to improve our souls in this life.  The myth thus reinforces the dialogue’s recommendation of the practice of philosophy as care for one’s soul.

e. Socrates’ Death (115a-118a)

The depiction of Socrates’ death that closes the Phaedo is rich in dramatic detail.  It also is complicated by a couple of difficult interpretative questions.

After Socrates has finished his tale about the afterlife, he says that it is time for him to prepare to take the hemlock poison required by his death sentence.  When Crito asks him what his final instructions are for his burial, Socrates reminds him that what will remain with them after death is not Socrates himself, but rather just his body, and tells him that they can bury it however they want.  Next he takes a bath—so that his corpse will not have to be cleaned post-mortem—and says farewell to his wife and three sons.  Even the officer sent to carry out Socrates’ punishment is moved to tears at this point, and describes Socrates as “the noblest, the gentlest and the best man” who has ever been at the prison.

Crito tells Socrates that some condemned men put off taking the poison for as long as possible, in order to enjoy their last moments in feasting or sex.  Socrates, however, asks for the poison to be brought immediately.  He drinks it calmly and in good cheer, and chastises his friends for their weeping.  When his legs begin to feel heavy, he lies down; the numbness in his body travels upward until eventually it reaches his heart.

Some contemporary scholars have challenged Plato’s description of hemlock-poisoning, arguing that in fact the symptoms would have been much more violent than the relatively gentle death he depicts.  If these scholars are right, why does Plato depict the death scene the way he does?  There is also a dispute about Socrates’ last words, which invoke a sacrificial offering made by the sick to the god of medicine: “Crito, we owe a cock to Asclepius; make this offering to him and do not forget.”  Did Socrates view life as a kind of sickness?

4. References and Further Reading

a. General Commentaries

  • Bostock, D. Plato’s Phaedo. Oxford, 1986.
    • In-depth yet accessible discussion of the dialogue’s arguments (does not include text of the Phaedo).  Includes a helpful chapter on the theory of Forms.
  • Dorter, K. Plato’s Phaedo: An Interpretation. University of Toronto Press, 1982.
    • Reading of the dialogue that combines both dramatic and doctrinal approaches (does not include text of the Phaedo).
  • Gallop, D. Plato: Phaedo. Oxford, 1975.
    • English translation with separate commentary that focuses on the dialogue’s argumentation.
  • Hackforth, R. Plato’s Phaedo: Translated with an Introduction and Commentary. Cambridge, 1955.
    • English translation with running commentary.
  • Rowe, C.J. Plato: Phaedo. Cambridge, 1993.
    • Original Greek text (no English) with introduction and detailed textual commentary.

b. The Philosopher and Death (59c-69e)

  • Pakaluk, M. “Degrees of Separation in the ‘Phaedo.’” Phronesis 48 (2003) 89-115.
    • Discusses Plato’s notion of the soul-body distinction at 63a-69e.
  • Warren, J. “Socratic Suicide.” The Journal of Hellenic Studies 121 (2001) 91-106.
    • On the Platonic philosopher’s attitude toward suicide in the 61e-69e passage.
  • Weiss, R. "The Right Exchange: Phaedo 69a6-c3". Ancient Philosophy 7 (1987) 57-66.
    • Examines the notion that wisdom is the highest goal of the philosopher.

c. Three Arguments for the Soul’s Immortality (69e-84b)

  • Ackrill, J.L. “Anamnēsis in the Phaedo,” in E.N. Lee and A.P.D. Mourelatos (eds.) Exegesis and Argument: Studies in Greek Philosophy Presented to Gregory Vlastos. Assen, 1973. 177-95.
    • On the theory of recollection (73c-75).
  • Apolloni, D. “Plato’s Affinity Argument for the Immortality of the Soul.” Journal of the History of Philosophy 34 (1996) 5-32.
    • A study of the argument at 78b-80d.
  • Gallop, D. “Plato’s ‘Cyclical Argument’ Recycled.” Phronesis 27 (1982) 207-222.
    • On the first argument for the soul’s immortality (69e-72e) and its relation to the other arguments.
  • Matthen, M.  “Forms and Participants in Plato’s Phaedo.”  Noûs 18:2 (1984) 281-297.
    • Discusses Plato’s argument concerning equals at 74b7-c6.
  • Nehamas, A. “Plato on the Imperfection of the Sensible World,” in G. Fine, ed., Plato 1: Metaphysics and Epistemology. Oxford, 1999. 171-191.
    • On Plato’s view of sensible particulars, especially at 72e-78b.

d. Objections from Simmias and Cebes, and Socrates’ Response (84c-107b)

  • Frede, D.  “The Final Proof of the Immortality of the Soul in Plato’s Phaedo 102a-107a.”  Phronesis 23 (1978) 27-41.
    • A defense of Plato’s argument and examination of its underlying assumptions regarding the soul.
  • Gottschalk, H.D. “Soul as Harmonia.” Phronesis 16 (1971) 179-198.
    • Discusses Simmias’ account of the soul beginning at 85e.
  • Vlastos, G. “Reasons and Causes in the Phaedo,” in Plato: A Collection of Critical Essays, Vol. I: Metaphysics and Epistemology.  Garden City, NY: Anchor Books, 1971.
    • Are Forms causes? An examination of 95e-105c.
  • Wiggins, D. “Teleology and the Good in Plato’s Phaedo.”  Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy 4 (1986) 1-18.
    • On Socrates’ “second voyage” beginning at 99c2-d1.

e. The Myth about the Afterlife (107c-115a)

  • Annas, J. “Plato’s Myths of Judgment.” Phronesis 27 (1982) 119-43.
    • A study of Plato’s myths in the GorgiasPhaedo, and Republic.
  • Morgan, K.A. Myth and Philosophy from the pre-Socratics to Plato. Cambridge, 2000.
    • Includes extensive background on myth in Plato, as well as discussion of the Phaedo myth in particular.
  • Sedley, D. “Teleology and Myth in the Phaedo.” Proceedings of the Boston Area Colloquium in Ancient Philosophy 5 (1990) 359–83.

f. Socrates’ Death (115a-118a)

  • Crook, J. “Socrates’ Last Words: Another Look at an Ancient Riddle.” Classical Quarterly 48 (1998) 117-125.
    • The papers by Crook and Most (cited below) consider some puzzles regarding Socrates’ final words at the dialogue’s end.
  • Gill, C. “The Death of Socrates.” Classical Quarterly 23 (1973) 25-25.
    • On the finer details of hemlock-poisoning.
  • Most, G.W. “A Cock for Asclepius.” Classical Quarterly 43 (1993) 96-111.
  • Stewart, D. “Socrates’ Last Bath.” Journal of the History of Philosophy 10 (1972) 253-9.
    • Looks at the deeper meaning of Socrates’ bath at 116a.
  • Wilson, E. The Death of Socrates. Harvard University Press, 2007.
    • Includes discussion of the death scene in the Phaedo, as well as its subsequent reception in Western philosophy, art, and culture.

Author Information

Tim Connolly
East Stroudsburg University
U. S. A.

Josiah Royce (1855—1916): Overview

Josiah Royce was one of the most influential philosophers of the period of classical American philosophy, the late nineteenth century through the early twentieth century. Although often identified as an exponent of Absolute Idealism, which is a philosophical view explored by Royce particularly in his Gifford Lectures, Royce was a thinker of widely diverse interests and talents. He made major contributions to psychology including a textbook in the field and was, in fact, elected President of the American Psychological Association. He wrote a history of California, considered today a forerunner of contemporary historiography in its attention to the role of women and minority groups. He explored social ethics, developing many ideas on the social grounding of the self, some of which were later expanded upon by George Herbert Mead. Furthermore, Royce wrote on pressing social and political problems of the day including race relations. W.E.B. Dubois was one of his students. He wrote literary criticism and can be considered the founder of the Harvard school of logic, Boolean algebra, and the foundation of mathematics. Among his students at Harvard were Clarence Irving Lewis who went on to pioneer modal logic, Edward V. Huntington, the first to axiomatize Boolean algebra, and Henry M. Sheffer, known for the eponymous Sheffer stroke. Royce has recently been cited as a proto-cybernetic thinker; another of his students was Norbert Wiener, the father of cybernetics. Royce also wrote on issues in the philosophy of science.

In addition to these many philosophical achievements, Royce made major contributions to the Philosophy of Religion, writing on the problem of evil, and Christian community and presenting a phenomenological study of the religious experience of ordinary people. Royce also wrote throughout his career on ethical theory and on the conditions for creating both genuine and supportive communities as well as creative, unique, ethical individuality. At the end of his life he turned to the development of a world community through a process of mediation and interpretation.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Thought and Works
    1. Royce's Philosophy of Community
    2. Royce's Ethics: The Philosophy of Loyalty
    3. Religion
    4. The Problem of Evil
    5. Logic
  3. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Published Editions
    3. Secondary Sources

1. Life

Josiah Royce was a Californian by birth, born on 20 November, 1855, in Grass Valley, the son of Josiah (1812-1888) and Sarah Eleanor (Bayliss) Royce (1819-1891), whose families were recent emigrants from England, and who sought their fortune in moving west in 1849. His pioneer mother Sarah was a central figure in forging a new social and political community in Grass Valley. She was the center of much musical activity with her melodeon, the first brought to California. She also helped found a church and served as a teacher of the young, including young Josiah. Under his mother’s tutelage, Josiah developed his love of literature, reading Milton and other literary works; made his acquaintance with the Bible and religious experience; was given an introduction to music and its beauty; and experienced the joys of a warm, loving community, his family, and particularly his mother and sisters. Young Josiah began his literary career with a delightful story of the travels of Pussy Blackie, a “Huckleberry Finn cat,” who runs away from home; gets bitten by a dog; is captured by an eagle; travels on a railroad car; lives in the house of a rich family; finds a cat companion with whom Pussy exchanges stories; discusses social issues such as the contrast between the rich and the poor, as well as the treatment of the less fortunate and moral questions such as honesty, shame, killing, and war. In 1866, the Royce family moved to San Francisco where Royce first attended the Lincoln School. Royce also attended San Francisco Boys’ High School where he had as a classmate the (later famous) physicist, Albert Michelson. Continuing his pioneer trek, Royce entered, at age fourteen, an infant University of California, later becoming one of its first graduates, thus participating in the beginnings of higher education in the state. After receiving his degree in Classics in 1875, Royce traveled to Germany to study philosophy for one year. He mastered the language while attending lectures in Heidelberg, Leipzig, and Göttingen. On his return, he entered the Johns Hopkins University in Baltimore and in 1878, was awarded one of its first four doctorates.

Josiah Royce returned to the University of California, Berkley from 1878-1882. He taught composition, and literature, published numerous philosophical articles and his Primer of Logical Analysis. He married Katherine Head in 1880; the couple had three sons (Christopher, 1882; Edward, 1886; Stephen, 1889) and remained married until Josiah’s death. Royce felt isolated in California, so far from the intellectual life of the East Coast, and he sought an academic post elsewhere. William James, Royce’s friend and philosophical antagonist, secured the opportunity for Royce to replace James at Harvard when James took a one-year sabbatical. In 1882, Royce accepted the position at half of James’ salary and brought his wife and newborn son across the continent to Cambridge, Massachusetts.

At Harvard, Royce began to develop his interest in a number of different areas. In 1885, he published his first major philosophical work, The Religious Aspect of Philosophy, proposing the idea that in order for our ordinary concepts of truth and error to have meaning, there must be an actual infinite mind, an “Absolute Knower,” who encompasses the totality of actual truths and possible errors. That same year, Royce received a permanent appointment as assistant professor at Harvard, where he continued to teach for thirty years. Among his students were such notables as T.S. Eliot, George Santayana, W.E.B. Dubois, Norbert Wiener, and C.I. Lewis, the logician.

Royce was a prolific writer as well as much demanded on the public lecture circuit. In 1886, he published his History of California; he followed this with a published novel in 1887. In 1892, Royce was appointed Professor of the History of Philosophy at Harvard, and he served as Chair of the Department of Philosophy from 1894-1898. During these years Royce established himself as a leading figure in American academic philosophy with his many reviews, lectures and books, including The Spirit of Modern Philosophy, (1892), The Conception of God (1897), and Studies in Good and Evil (1898).

In 1899, and 1900, Royce delivered the prestigious Gifford Lectures at the University of Aberdeen, taking this opportunity to consolidate his thoughts on metaphysics. The result was his two-volume opus, The World and the Individual (1899-1901). This point appeared to be the culmination of Royce’s work. His public reputation was at a high and at 45 years old, Royce was elected President of the American Psychological Association in 1902, and President of the American Philosophical Association in 1903. Reviewers of The World and the Individual praised Royce’s philosophical acumen but there were serious objections to his conclusions. Sparked by these and the criticisms of his logic by Charles Sanders Peirce, Royce began reconsideration of his arguments as well as extensive study in mathematical logic. He also returned to his earlier concerns with philosophy as a means to understand human life, the nature of human society, of religious experience, ethical action, suffering and the problem of evil. His major work on ethics, The Philosophy of Loyalty appeared in 1908, but his concern with ethical issues and the “art” of loyalty continued until his death. He published a collection of essays, Race Questions, Provincialisms, and Other American Problems in 1908 and another, William James and Other Essays on the Philosophy of Life, appeared in 1911.

In 1912, while recovering from a stroke, Royce published The Sources of Religious Insight, in which he sought an explanation for the phenomena of ordinary religious faith as experienced by ordinary religious communities and individuals. He considered this a correction to James’ The Varieties of Religious Experience (The Gifford Lectures, 1901-1902), which, in Royce’s judgment, put too much emphasis on extraordinary and individualistic religious experiences. Drawing on the semiotic of Peirce and other sources, in 1913, Royce published his opus on religious community, The Problem of Christianity, a work which Yale philosopher, John E. Smith identified as “one of the finest works in the philosophy of religion ever to appear on the American scene” (Smith 1982 &1992, 122). In place of the earlier “Absolute Knower,” Royce presents the concept of an infinite community of interpretation, guided by a shared spirit of truth-seeking and community building. The Universal Community constitutes reality, and its understanding increases over time, through its members’ continual development of meaning. Royce’s concern for building a universal or “Beloved Community” is exemplified in two later works focused on building peace and a world community: War and Insurance (1914) and The Hope of the Great Community (1916). In the 1914 book, Royce made a daring political and economic proposal to use the economic power of insurance to mediate hostilities among nations, and reduce the attraction of war in the future.

Royce died September 14, 1916, before he could develop fully his new philosophical insights. Unfortunately, Royce’s works were ignored until recently and now are being revisited by theologians and philosophers interested in not only metaphysics, but also practical and theoretical ethics, philosophy of religion, philosophy of self and of community.

2. Thought and Works

Royce’s major works include The Religious Aspect of Philosophy (1885), The World and the Individual (1899-1901), The Spirit of Modern Philosophy (1892), The Philosophy of Loyalty (1908), and The Problem of Christianity (1913). In his early works, Royce presented a novel defense of idealism, the “argument from error,” and arrived at the concept of an actual infinite mind, an “Absolute Knower,” that encompasses all truths and possible errors. The correspondence theory of truth requires that if an idea or judgment is true it must correctly represent its object; when an idea does not correctly represent its object, it is an error. Royce begins with the fact that the human mind often makes such errors and yet, argued Royce, the mind “intends” or “points to” the idea’s true object. Thus, the occurrence of these errors indicates that the true object of any idea must exist, in a fully determinate state, in some actual infinite mind; this actual infinite “Mind” is the “Absolute Knower.” Royce continued to pursue this move toward Idealism in The World and the Individual. Here we find Royce agreeing with Kantian critical rationalism that a true idea is one that may be fulfilled or validated by a possible experience, but he argued that such a possibility of experience required the existence of an actual being, whose nature was to be the true object of the experience. In this work, Royce engages in criticism of three major views of metaphysics, Realism, Mysticism, and Kant’s Critical Rationalism. He finds valuable points in all three views, but also critical weaknesses. He advocates a “Fourth Conception of Being,” a view of the totality of Being as an actual Infinite, timeless, and encompassing all valid past, present, and future possible experience of fact including the facts of all finite beings.

Royce continued to develop his thoughts spurred by various criticisms and particularly the friendly but longstanding dispute with William James known as "The Battle of the Absolute." In addition, he struggled with the problem of community and the relations of the individual and community both philosophically and practically, the latter concern evidenced in his writings on the history of California, the land disputes in California, various public problems and his deep concern for a solid theory of ethics. In answer to Charles Sanders Peirce, he turned to a deep exploration of logic, mathematics, and semiotics. In his later works, Royce dispenses with the “Absolute Mind/Knower” of previous works and develops a metaphysical view which characterizes reality as a universe of ideas or signs which occur in the process of being interpreted by an ongoing, infinite community of minds. These minds and the community they constitute also become signs for further interpretation. In The Problem of Christianity he sees representation no longer as a static, one-time experience, but as having creative, synthetic and selective aspects and knowledge is now more than accurate and completed perception of an object, or complete conception of an idea, it is a process of interpretation. This new metaphysical view is reflected in Royce’s work on ethics, philosophy of religion, philosophy of community, social philosophy and logic.

a. Royce's Philosophy of Community

Royce was concerned about the impact of an extreme individualism and particularly with the “heroic individualism” associated with Walt Whitman, Ralph Waldo Emerson, and William James. Though inspiring as ethical visions, Royce believed these views eventually proved unsatisfactory for ethical life. While affirming the "individual" as a "most fundamental phenomenon," he sought to address the problem of forming satisfactory communities and dealing with competing forms of community. In his later metaphysics Royce affirms the full-fledged reality of both individuals and community. In the practical social and political realm, Royce tackled the dual issues of “enlightened/genuine individualism,” and “true/genuine community.” He recognized that the task of building authentic individuality and encouraging the growth of fulfilling, moral communities were inextricably bound together—worthwhile individuality and community arising out of their mutual interaction in a creative, ongoing, infinite process.

Thus, Royce develops the following claims: (1) individuals are inextricably rooted in the social context and true individuality is forged out of that context. An individual is both self-made and a social product and the worthiness of the end result, the individual self, is the responsibility of both individual and community; (2) community is a social product, but true community is created by the hard work of free, self-conscious, self-committed, self-creative moral individuals; (3) the task of the individual is both to fashion a “beautiful life” and to build a “beautiful” community, while the obligation of community is to build a harmony of wills while also fostering the development of true individuals; (4) individuals are finite, sinful and fallible and need to extend self to develop morality and overcome error. Furthermore, individuals crave harmony and relationship. Individuals keep communities alive, moral, and sane by keeping them from stagnating into inveterate habit, moving toward exclusivity and intolerance, or degenerating into mob madness. In other words, stress must be equally on the individual and the community. For Royce, “individuals without community are without substance, while communities without individuals are blind.”

In light of the strong individualistic emphasis in philosophy today, it is striking that for Royce communities are logically prior to individuals. For Royce, there is no personal identity unless there are communities of persons that provide causes and social roles for individuals to embrace. Royce declares: “My life means nothing, either theoretically or practically, unless I am a member of a community” (Royce 2001 [1913], 357). And community is more than any association or collection of individuals; communities can only exist, in Royce’s view, where individual members are in communication with one another and there exists to some relevant way a congruence of feeling, thought and will among them. A community is for Royce, as is the human self, a temporal being. He speaks of a community of memory and ac community of hope. Each of the community’s members accepts, as part of his/her own individual life and self, some past events and the same expected future events. And, like human selves, communities are “plans of action” engaged in purposive activity in the world and constituting a will and a spirit and, for Royce, also, like human selves, morally responsible for its communal actions.

b. Royce's Ethics: The Philosophy of Loyalty

At the center of Royce’s ethics is his contention that to lead a morally significant life, one’s actions must express a self-consciously asserted will; the self is a plan of action, a plan of life created by an individual out of the chaos of many conflicting personal desires and impulses. Such a plan is forged when one finds a cause, or causes which require a program or programs of implementation that extend through time and requires the contributions of many individuals for their advancement and fulfillment. When an individual finds a cause judged worthwhile, his/her will becomes focused and defined in terms of that cause and furthermore, the individual becomes allied with a community of others who are also committed to that same cause. Royce calls this commitment “loyalty” and thus the moral life of an individual is understood in terms of the multiple loyalties that a person embraces. “There is only one way to be an ethical individual. That is to choose your cause, and then to serve it” (Royce 1995 [l908], 47).

According to Royce’s careful definition of loyalty, “genuine” loyalty is intended to rule out loyalty to morally evil causes and communities that serve them. Royce fully recognized that many of the worst deed in human history have involved a high degree of loyalty, but, argued Royce, these loyalties were directed exclusively to a particular group and expressed in the destruction of the conditions for others’ loyal actions, Royce describes the difference between true loyalty and vicious or “predatory” loyalty as follows:

A cause is good, not only for me, but for mankind, in so far, as it is essentially a “loyalty to loyalty,” that is, an aid, and a furtherance of loyalty in my fellows. It is an evil cause in so far as, despite the loyalty that it arouses in me, it is destructive of loyalty in the world of my fellows (Royce 1995 {1908}, 56).

Communities defined by true loyalty, or adherence to a cause that exemplifies the universal ideal of “loyalty to loyalty” are referred to by Royce as “genuine communities.” Again, the degenerate communities are those that tend toward the destruction of other’s causes and possibilities of loyalty. While every community works for the accomplishment of its central cause, Royce places significant emphasis on the idea of loyalty to a “lost cause.” A lost cause is not a hopeless cause but rather one that cannot be fulfilled within the actual lifetime of any of its members. These causes are those that are “lost” simply in virtue of their scope and magnitude and these are precisely the causes that establish ideals capable of evoking our highest hope and moral commitment. “Lost causes” are indispensable, in Royce’s view, as the source of absolute norms for any community and its members.

For Royce, chief among such causes is the full attainment of truth, the complete determination of the nature of reality through inquiry and interpretation. Thus, the formula of “loyalty to loyalty” demands that one’s moral and intellectual sphere become ever broader and remain critical at all levels. In this connection, Royce reframed two central ideas or principles of pragmatism. Following James in his essay, “The Will to Believe,” Royce agreed that any philosophical view is essentially an expression of individual volition. We must first decide how we are to approach the world and then develop our philosophical theories accordingly. For Royce, the essential attitude of will that one must adopt toward the world is “loyalty to the ideal of an ultimate truth.” Secondly, Royce adopted the pragmatist view of truth, that is, truth is the property possessed by those ideas that succeed in the long run. And, following Peirce, Royce argues that to define truth using any conception of “the long run, short of the ideal end of inquiry, is self-refuting.” Having adopted these pragmatic principles, Royce referred to his own position as “Absolute Pragmatism.”

Returning to the principles of “loyalty to loyalty,” it becomes clear that, for Royce, all communities we actually know, inhabit, or identify with, are finite and to varying degrees “predatory.” Roycean loyalty requires one to scrutinize the aims and actions of our communities and those of others and to work to reform the disloyal aspects. The philosophy of loyalty calls upon us to create and embrace more cosmopolitan and inclusive communities. However, any human community, however, inclusive and committed to loyalty to loyalty, will fall short of perfect loyalty. Each community must constantly engage in critical scrutiny and actions of reform. For Royce, there is no expectation that the high ideals of perfect loyalty, truth, and reality will ever be fully realized. The process of building community is an ongoing, infinite process.

Finally, for Royce, beyond the actual communities that we directly encounter in life there is the ideal “Beloved Community” of all those who would be fully dedicated to the cause of loyalty, truth, and reality itself. This is the ultimate goal and cause. Furthermore, the sharing of individuals’ feeling, thoughts and wills in a community (including the Beloved Community) is never, for Royce, a mystical blurring or annihilation of personal identities. Individuals remain individuals, but in forming a community they build or attain a second order life that extends beyond any of their individuals lives. This life is a life coordinated through a cause and extended over time, a super-human personality at work, a community united by an “interpreting spirit.” Again, communities are more than their individual members and individuals are always unique and not lost in their communities; individuals and communities need each other.

c. Religion

Through the strong influence of his mother, Sarah Royce, and the early education she provided him and his sisters, Royce was well acquainted with the Christian Protestant world view and his writings exhibited a consistent familiarity with Scripture and with religious themes. Royce, in his own life did not embrace organized Christianity, and he was critical of many historical churches, believing that they had lost sight of the “spirit” of community that ought to guide them. He identified many “communities of grace,” genuine communities of loyalty, that were non-Christian or not self-consciously religious. Royce had a great respect for Buddhism and he even learned Sanskrit to study religious texts in this language. Although Royce maintained a strong interest in logic, science, evolutionary theory, and natural philosophy throughout his career, religious concerns did figure prominently in a number of his works beginning with his first major publication, The Religious Aspect of Philosophy as well as in his last two major works, The Sources of Religious Insight and The Problem of Christianity. The Sources was Royce’s response to the Gifford Lectures delivered by William James in 1901-1902 and published as The Varieties of Religious experience. James’ lectures were a popular and academic success and remain so even today. Royce, however, believed that James placed too much emphasis on the extraordinary religious experience of extraordinary individuals and thus failed to capture the religious experiences of the ordinary individual. Furthermore, Royce believed that religion was a central phenomenon of human experience that could not be ignored by philosophers. In The Problem of Christianity Royce works out his own religious thought and his full-blown theory of community. He maintains that the Christian model of the “loyal community,” properly understood, successfully combined the true spirit of universal interpretation with an appreciation of the “infinite worth” of the individual as a unique member of the ideal Beloved Community, the Kingdom of Heaven (Royce 2001[1913], 193). It is in this book that Royce also brings to fruition his thought and concern with the problem of evil.

Royce’s approach to religion was empirical, historical and phenomenological as well as concerned with philosophical reflection. Thus, in a 1909 essay, “What is Vital in Christianity?,” Royce approaches religion with a historic-empirical approach akin to modern anthropology. He views the religion as it has developed within human history. He writes: “any religion presents itself as a more or less connected group: (1) of religious practices, such as prayers, ceremonies, festivals, rituals and other observance, and (2) of religious ideas, the ideas taking the form of traditions, legends, and beliefs about the gods or spirits” (Royce 1911 [1909], 101). The term “vital,” says Royce, is metaphoric, such as the “vital” features of an organism. If these changed the organism would not necessarily be destroyed but would be an essentially different type of organism. Royce illustrates with the features, gill breathing” and “lung breathing.” But “vital,” also connotes “alive” for the persons who are followers of the religion and this usage is similar to Paul Tillich’s understanding of religious symbols as alive or dying. Furthermore, this term means also “primary” in practice. Thus, Royce says his first question is: “What is more vital about a religion: its religious practices, or its religious ideas, beliefs, and spiritual attitudes?” In this essay, in a humorous passage about pigeons in the Harvard Yard observing the habits of humans who feed them and concluding to the existence of a benevolent creator, Royce critiques the causal approach to God, represented in many of the proofs for God’s existence.

Royce again approaches religion through a historical-philosophical analysis in an encyclopedia article entitled “Monotheism.” After briefly reviewing monotheism as a doctrine in contrast to polytheism and pantheism, Royce makes the following claim: “…from the historical point of view, three different ways of viewing the divine being have been of great importance both for religious life and for philosophical doctrine” (Royce 1916, 818). The three ways to which Royce refers are three forms of monotheism, which were established in India, Greece, and Israel.

Royce then discusses, what in his view, are the essential features of monotheism as developed in these three cultural contexts. From Israel, we have “the ethical monotheism of the Prophets of Israel,” and “God,” in this religious context is defined as “the righteous Ruler of the world,” as the “Doer of justice,” or as the one “whose law is holy” or “who secures the triumph of the right”(Royce, 1916). Turning to Greece and to “Hellenistic monotheism,” God is defined as the “source, of the explanation, or the correlate, or the order, or the reasonableness of the world” (Royce, 1916). The third type of monotheism is labeled “Hindu pantheism.” Royce notes that this understanding had many different historical origins and appeared, in fact, as part of the Neo-Platonic philosophy and the philosophy of Spinoza. This type of monotheism insists not only upon the “sole” reality of God, but also asserts the “unreality of the world” (Royce, 1916).

In an interesting move, Royce argues that the “whole history of Christian monotheism depends upon an explicit effort to make a synthesis of the ethical monotheism of Israel and the Hellenic form of monotheism (Royce, 1916) This effort, however, says Royce, has proven especially difficult. The Hellenic tradition with its intellectualistic emphasis on the Logos was in favor of defining the unity of the divine being and the world as the essential feature of monotheism, whereas ethical monotheism dwells upon the contrast between the righteous Ruler and the sinful world, and between divine grace and fallen man. Royce, then, concludes:

Therefore, behind many of the conflicts between the so-called pantheism in Christian tradition and the doctrines of “divine transcendence” and “divine personality,” there has lain the conflict between intellectualism and voluntarism, between an interpretation of the world in terms of order and an interpretation of the world in terms of the conflict between good and evil, righteousness and unrighteousness (Royce, 1916, 819).

This history is made even more complex, says Royce, due to the influence of the Indic type of God. This concept influenced mysticism and, of course, Neo-platonic philosophy which, in turn, influenced Christian philosophy and theology. Augustine is a prime example of this influence. Furthermore, within Christianity, the mystics have often pointed to the failure to resolve the conflict with the moral and intellectual interests. Royce writes:

The mystics…have always held that the results of the intellect are negative and lead to no definite idea of God which can be defended against the skeptics, while…to follow the law of righteousness, whether or not with the aid of divine grace, does not lead, at least in the present life, to the highest type of knowledge of God (Royce, 1916).

Then, Royce, with his respect for the experiential in religion, writes: “Without this third type of monotheism, and without this negative criticism of the work of the intellect, and this direct appeal to immediate experience, Christian doctrine, in fact, would not have reached some of its most characteristic forms and expressions, and the philosophy of Christendom would have failed to put on record some of its most fascinating speculations" (Royce, 1916).

Royce then reviews the history of the so-called “proofs for God’s existence,” generally an expression of the Hellenistic influence in Christianity, and says that there is some basis in the claim that these efforts to grasp the divine nature via the intellect leads to results remote “from the vital experience upon which religious monotheism, and in particular, Christian monotheism must rest, if such…is permanently to retain the confidence of a man who is at once critical and religious (Royce, 1916).

Finally, it is not surprising that Royce argues that whatever answers to the questions about the nature of the world – is it real, rational, ethical? – that are developed must not put exclusive emphasis on any one characteristic. For, “as we have seen, the problem of monotheism requires a synthesis of all the three ideas of God,” thus any attempt to address these three questions must be an answer that does adequate justice to the three ideas and the three problems (Royce, 1916). Royce’s own efforts were aimed at achieving this synthesis and providing an answer to these three questions. Thus, he sought in his conceptions of God to give an account of the nature of reality that would satisfy the “moral insight,” “the theoretic insight,” and the “religious insight.” And the three Conceptions of Being addressed in The World and the Individual embody aspects of the three ideas of God and address the three questions.

Turning now to The Sources of Religious Insight, as indicated earlier, it is a parallel to The Varieties of Religious Experience by William James, yet it transcends that work in a number of ways. First, it explores religious experience common to much of mankind rather than the special, genius cases that are the subject of James’ work. Second, it studies both individual and communal religious experience whereas James’ work focuses on the experiences of extraordinary individuals. Third, The Sources is solidly based in the empirical and experiential. Royce writes: “The issue will be one regarding the facts of living experience” (Royce, 1912). James, in his work seeks to explain man’s religious need in terms of an experience that wells up from the subliminal self, from the soundless depths of our own subconscious. Royce, on the other hand, asserts that, “the principal religious motives are indeed perfectly natural human motives” (Royce, 1912,41-42). Man’s religious experience is, as a natural process, an incident in the history of his sensitive life, of his personal interpretation of the world, and of his more or less creative effort to fulfill his needs, and to respond in his own way to the universe. Religious experience, then, for Royce, is natural and profoundly personal and social - it is the experience of a human self in the history of his own life, set in the material, historical, social, and cultural context of that individual history and life.

Beginning then with human experience and needs, Royce seeks to get at the heart of “religious experience.” He states that the “central and essential postulate” of every religion is that “man needs to be saved” (Royce 2001[1912], 8-9). Salvation is necessary, for Royce, for two reasons: (1) There is some aim or end of human life which is more important than all other aims; and (2) Man, as he now is, or is naturally, is always in great danger of missing this highest aim and thus to render his whole life “a senseless failure” (Royce 2001 [1912], 12). This salvation must come in the form of guidance about understanding and achieving the highest aim of life so far as one is able. But given the limitations and fallibility of the human perspective, which hardly extends “beyond one’s nose,” Royce contends that this needed guidance must come from some super-human source. Religion, then, is the sphere of life in which finite human beings are able to get in touch with this source. It is interesting that in seeking to demonstrate the validity of his postulate he reviews the essentials of Buddhism, the writings of Plato in The Republic, and various literary sources. He believes that these examples show that the search for salvation belongs to no “one type of piety or of poetry or of philosophy” (Royce, 1912, 15).

The next major question is “what are the sources of insight?” Royce will consider seven sources, beginning with the human self, viewed first as uniquely individual and then as social. These are the basic and most elementary. However, Royce will find individual life and social life insufficient to meet the religious need for salvation. He then turns to five other sources. These are all dependent on the first two sources but will develop, strengthen, correct and transform in some way these. The five are: reason as a synthesizing power; the will or the volitional; loyalty; the religious mission of sorrow, and the unified community of the spirit.

In turning to the individual alone with his problem of salvation and with his efforts to know the divine that can save, Royce asserts that the individual can be in touch with a genuine source of insight, one of value, although also a source with limits. There are, says Royce, three objects which individual experience, as a source of religious insight, can reveal: The Ideal, the Need, and the Deliverer. The Ideal is, of course, the standard in terms of which the individual estimates the sense and value of his personal life. The Need for salvation is that degree to which he falls short of attaining his ideal and is sundered from this Ideal by evil fortune, his own paralysis of will, or by his inward baseness. The Deliverer is that presence, that power, that light, that truth, that great companion who helps the individual and saves him from his need.

We as humans are creatures of wavering and conflicting motives and, although we strongly desire a unity that makes life meaningful, we, on our own, cannot find this unity; we always miss our mark. Furthermore, we have glimpses of what would fulfill us, what would meet our need: a life “infinitely richer than our own.” As James, argues, we want to get in touch with something that will give us a “new dimension” to our lives. We want something more. Furthermore, for Royce, our need and desire are crucial. Royce writes: “Unless you have inwardly felt the need of salvation and learned to hunger and thirst after spiritual unity and self-possession, all the rest of religious insight is to you a sealed book” (Royce 1912, 33).

However, the individual alone cannot achieve what is needed. Thus we must turn to the social and to shared human life to attain a broader religious insight. Royce writes: “…no one who remains content with his merely individual experience of the presence of the divine and of his deliverer, has won the whole of any true insight. For as a fact, we are all members one of another; and I can have no insight into the way of my salvation unless I thereby learn of the way of salvation for all my brethren. And there is no unity of the spirit unless all men are privileged to enter it whenever they see it and know it and love it” (Royce, 1912, 34). Here is Royce’s emphasis on the need for social expansion of the self, as loyalty to loyalty demands expansion of the perspective of the community. Indeed, Royce argues that one of the principal sources of our need for salvation is our narrowness of view and especially of the meaning of our own purposes and motives. The social world, as Royce has constantly argued, broadens our outlook; an individual corrects his own narrowness by trying to share his fellow’s point of view. Social responsibilities can set limits to our fickleness; social discipline can keep us from indulging all our caprices; human companionship may steady our vision. The social world may bring us in touch with our public, great self, wherein we may find our “soul and its interests writ large” (Royce, 1912, 55). Social life is a source of religious insight and the insight it can bring is knowledge of “salvation through the fostering of human brotherhood” (Royce, 1912, 58).

Another avenue to religious insight, for Royce, is the experience of moral suffering, of the deep sense of guilt accompanied by the belief that one is an outcast from human sympathy and is hopelessly alone. He illustrates this with two literary examples: “The Ancient Mariner” and Raskolnikov in Crime and Punishment. The central conception in these two literary pieces is of salvation as reconciliation both with the social and the divine order, an escape from the wilderness of lonely guilt to the realm where men can understand one another.

This brings us directly to the “religious mission of sorrow.” Sorrows are defined by Royce as evils that we can assimilate. These become part of a constructive process, which involves growth rather than destruction, a passage to a new life. We takes these sorrows up into our plan of life, give them new meaning as they become part of a new whole. This was Royce’s emphasis in his essays on the problem of evil as well as in Religious Aspect and The Spirit. This will be discussed more in the section on the Problem of Evil.

The stage is now set for The Problem of Christianity. Christianity is viewed as a “philosophy of life,” and the question Royce asks is “In what sense, if any, can the modern man consistently be, in creed, a Christian?” (Royce, 2001 [1913], 62). In focusing on “creed,” however, Royce is clear that he is not concerned here with dogma or with particular theological beliefs. Rather he seeks the essentially “vital” and living ideas that will find expression in communal practices and religious-moral living and that will speak to all humanity. Royce will focus on living religious experience as was expressed in the early Pauline Christian communities. Royce’s focus is on the incarnation of the Spirit in the living Church, it is the Church, rather than the person of the founder that is the central idea of Christianity. For Royce, the essence of Christianity is its stress on the “saving community.” Royce writes: “The thesis of this book is that the essence of Christianity, as the Apostle Paul stated that essence, depends upon regarding the being which the early Christian Church believed itself to represent, and the being which I call…the ‘Beloved Community,’ as the true source, through loyalty, of the salvation of man” (Royce, 2001 [1913], 45).

It is indeed the “community” which allows us to understand more fully the teachings of the Master. Of Jesus’ teaching, Royce found two ideas especially crucial: his preaching of love and the “Kingdom of Heaven.” Both were mysterious and in need of interpretation. Thus, “love” is a mystery for although we know we are to love God and our neighbor, the question is how. How can I be practically useful in meeting my neighbor’s needs? Anyone who has tried to be benevolent or to meet the needs of others knows that there can be a huge crevice between your interpretation of what that person needs and their belief in that matter. It is the interpretation of Jesus’ teachings in the letters of Paul that make the difference for Royce. That which can make the loving of our neighbor less mysterious and difficult is community, for a community “when united by an active developing purpose is an entity more concrete, and, in fact, less mysterious than any individual man (Royce, 2001 [1913] 94). In community, we can come to know each other, to see what each other’s needs are. I need not ask “who is my neighbor?” for my neighbor and I are both members of one and the same community.

The essence of Christianity, for Royce, is contained in three ideas. The first of these is that the source and means of salvation is the community of believers. Community is also the basis of the ethic of love taught by Jesus. The other two essential ideas are: “the moral burden of the individual and “atonement.” These are addressed in the section on evil.

d. The Problem of Evil

Josiah Royce struggled with the problem of evil throughout his life, exploring it from various approaches, and asserting that it could neither be avoided nor dismissed by either the philosopher or the ordinary person. Thus, unlike some philosophers, he did not believe the problem of evil could be solved as a practical problem that only required improving social conditions. As a native Californian, a historian, and a social observer of the development of early California, Royce explored ways in which evil manifested itself in social relations among persons, in social bodies infected with racism, greed, and in a variety of harmful prejudices, in expressions of hate and in mob violence. Ultimately, Royce embraced a theistic process metaphysics that recognizes evil as a real force and suffering as an irreducible fact of experience. In his 1897 essay, “The Problem of Job,” Royce presents a fairly succinct overview of the problem of evil, various solutions and his own view on a possible solution. In the Job story, we have a traditional view of God as wise, omnipotent, all powerful, and all good and the situation of Job, namely, a universal situation of unearned ill-fortune, a seeming persecution of a righteous person and a reigning down of evils on a good man. For Royce, Job represents the fundamental psychological fact about the problem of evil, namely, the universal experience of unearned ill-fortune. This, asserts Royce, is the experience of every person, the kind of evil that all persons can see for themselves every day if they choose. This is the fundamental experiential and psychological fact that grounds Royce’s own answers to the problem of evil and also his dismissal of the various traditional answers to the problem of evil. Thus, for example there is the view that the purpose of the world is “soul making,” that pain teaches us the ways of the world and helps us develop our higher potentialities. Royce believes this answer is inadequate because it presupposes a greater evil, namely a world which allows evils as the only way to reach given goals. Such an answer Royce believes is unacceptable to a sufferer of evil and undeserved ills.

Another answer to the problem of evil is the infinite worth of agents with free will. Royce finds value in this view in that it acknowledges evil as a logically necessary part of a perfect moral order, but he believes this answer ultimately fails. A major problem is Job’s situation, namely, the innocent sufferer. Such unearned ills may be partly due to the free will that partly caused them, but, asserts Royce, the unearned ills are also due to God who declines to protect the innocent.

Royce believes that as long as one views God as an external power, as Job did, the problem of evil cannot be solved. Rather, one must recognize God as internally present to us and as suffering with us to produce the higher good. When we suffer, our sufferings are God’s sufferings and this is the case because without suffering, evil, and tragedy, God’s life could not be perfected. Furthermore, asserts Royce, personal overcoming evil is the essence of the moral life. Persons are instruments of God’s triumph. Thus, in The Sources of Religious Insight, Royce presents man as a destroyer of evil, a being who uses every effort to get rid of evil. Conquering evils and oppressions provide man’s greatest opportunities for loyalty and here is the source of religious insight and spiritual triumph. The encounter of human selves with the problem of evil is, for Royce, the most important moral aspect of the world. One must see the problematic situation into which human selves are immersed as part of the atoning process which tends toward an ultimate reconciliation of finite conflicts. Confronted with evils, one needs to trust within one’s limited view that the Spirit of the Universal Community reconciles.

Ultimately, Royce sees evil as an eternal part of both human and divine consciousness and the most important moral fact of the universe the human conquering of evil step by step. In addressing the doctrine of atonement in The Problem, Royce sets out in detail how the loyal community can best respond to human evil. The highest transgression in an ethics of loyalty is treason, or the willful betrayal of one’s own cause and the community of people who serve it. Such a betrayal is moral suicide for it threatens to destroy the network of purposes and social relationships that define the traitor’s self. The traitor is in what Royce calls “the hell of the irrevocable” (Royce, 2001 [1913], 162). Royce seeks an explanation of atonement which acknowledges this irrevocable nature of the deed that has been done, and which changes everything for the sinner and the community that has been harmed. None of the tradition Christian accounts of atonement are satisfactory. The answer, for Royce, is that the act of atonement can only be accomplished by the community, or on the behalf of the community, through the steadfast “loyal servant who acts, so to speak, as the incarnation of the spirit of the community itself” (Royce, 2011 [1913], 180). This person serves as a mediating party between the traitor and the betrayed community and through the atoning act genuine community is restored and all the individuals may emerge as wiser, more commitment servants of their common cause. Things are not the same as before the treason but, in fact, transformed and better. Royce then states what he believes to be the central postulate of the highest form of human spirituality, namely, that “No baseness or cruelty of treason so deep or so tragic shall enter our human world, but that loyal love shall be able in due time to oppose to just that deed of treason its fitting deed of atonement” (Royce 2001 [1913], 186). In the spirit of James, Royce asserts that this postulate cannot be proven true, but human communities can assert it and act upon it as it is were true.

e. Logic

Royce pursued his interest in logic, mathematics and science throughout his career. His first published book was a Primer of Logical Analysis for the Use of Composition Students, written for his students in California in 1881. His own proposal for a system of formal logic was published as “The Relation of the Principles of Logic to the Foundations of Geometry” in 1905, a work later extended in 1914. Among his last writings were a series of encyclopedia articles on logical topics: Axiom, Error and Truth, Mind, Negation, and Order (all reprinted in Robinson, 1951).

In addition to his discussion of science in The Religious Aspect of Philosophy, The World and the Individual, and in The Problem of Christianity, Royce published a series of articles on scientific method:” The Mechanical, Historical and the Statistical,” “The Social Character of Scientific Inquiry,” (in Josiah Royce’s Late Writings); Hypotheses and Leading Ideas,” and Introduction to H. Poincaré, The Foundations of Science (reprinted in Robinson). Like Peirce, Royce argued for the self-corrective nature of the scientific method; the necessity of experience as the starting point of inquiry; an emphasis on scientific instinct and imaginative judgment in forming hypotheses; the requirement of a proper motive - the search for truth and not fame or profit - as a necessary condition, along with the correct method, for the success of science and essence of science, the notion of science as a communal endeavor, dependent on the contributions of many others, past, present and future, and finally for the thoroughly human and fallible nature of science.

3. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Royce, Josiah, Primer of Logical Analysis for the Use of Composition Students, San Francisco, California: A.L. Bancroft and Co., 1881.
  • Royce, Josiah, The Religious Aspect of Philosophy: A critique of the Bases of Conduct and Faith, Boston, New York: Houghton Mifflin & Co., 1885.
  • Royce, Josiah, California from the Conquest in 1846 to the Second Vigilance Committee in San Francisco [1856]: A Study of American Character, Boston and New York: Houghton, Mifflin and Co. 1886.
  • Royce, Josiah, The Spirit of Modern Philosophy: An Essay in the Form of Lectures, Boston: Houghton Mifflin, 1892.
  • Royce, Josiah, The Conception of God: A Philosophical Discussion Concerning the Nature of the Divine Idea as a Demonstrable Reality, New York: The Macmillan Co, 1897. This includes commentary by Joseph LeConte, George Holmes Howison, and Sidney Edward Mezes.
  • Royce, Josiah, Studies in Good and Evil, New York, Appleton, 1898.
  • Royce, Josiah, The World and the Individual, 2 vols., New York: Macmillan, 1899.
  • Royce, Josiah, Outlines of Psychology: An Elementary Treatise with Some Practical Applications, New York: Macmillan, 1903.
  • Royce, Josiah, The Philosophy of Loyalty, New York: Macmillan, 1908.
  • Royce, Josiah, Race Questions, Provincialism, and Other American Problems, New York: Macmillan, 1908.
  • Royce, Josiah, William James and Other Essays on the Philosophy of Life, New York: Macmillan, 1911.
  • Royce, Josiah, The Sources of Religious Insight, Washington, D.C.: Catholic University of America Press, 2001 [1913].
  • Royce, Josiah, The Problem of Christianity, Washington, D.C.: Catholic University of America Press, 2001 [1913].
  • Royce, Josiah, War and Insurance, New York: Macmillan, 1914.
  • Royce, Josiah, The Hope of the Great Community, New York: Macmillan, 1916.

b. Published Editions

  • Robinson, D.S., ed. Royce’s Logical Essays: Collected Logical Essays of Josiah Royce, Dubuque, Iowa: W. C. Brown, 1951.
  • McDermott, J.J., ed. The Basic Writings of Josiah Royce, New York: Fordham University Press, 2 vols., 2005 [1969].
  • Clendenning, J., Ed. The Letters of Josiah Royce, Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1970.
  • Oppenheim, F., ed. Josiah Royce’s Late Writings: A Collection of Unpublished and Scattered Works, Bristol: Thoemmes Press, 2 vols.

c. Secondary Sources

  • Auxier, R, ed., Critical Responses to Josiah Royce, 1885-1916, Bristol: Thoemmes Press, 3 vols., 2000.
  • Auxier, R, Time, Will, and Purpose: Living Ideas From the Philosophy of Josiah Royce, Open Court, 2011.
  • Clendenning, The Life and Thought of Josiah Royce, revised and expanded ed., Nashville, Tennessee: Vanderbilt University Press, 1999.
  • Kegley, J., Genuine Individuals and Genuine Communities: A Roycean Public Philosophy, Nashville, Tennessee, 1997.
  • Kegley, J. Josiah Royce in Focus, Bloomington, Indiana: Indiana University Press, 2008.
  • Kiklick, B., Josiah Royce: An Intellectual Biography, Indianapolis, Indiana: Hackett Publishing Company, Inc., 1985.
  • Marcel, G., Royce’s Metaphysics, trans. V. and G. Ringer, Chicago: Henry Regnery Company, 1956. This was originally published as La Mėtaphysique de Royce, Paris, 1945.
  • Oppenheim, F.M. Royce’s Voyage Down Under: A Journey of the Mind, Lexington: University of Kentucky Press, 1980.
  • Oppenheim, F.M., Royce’s Mature Philosophy of Religion, Notre Dame, Indiana: University of Notre Dame Press, 1987.
  • Oppenheim, F.M., Royce’s Mature Ethics, Notre Dame, Indiana: University of Notre Dame Press, 1993.
  • Oppenheim, F.M., Reverence for the Relations of Life: Re-examining Pragmatism via Josiah Royce’s Interactions with Peirce, James, and Dewey, Notre Dame, Indiana: University of Notre Dame Press, 2005.
  • Smith, J.E. Royce South Infinite: The Community of Interpretation, Hamden, Conn.: Archon Books, 1969.
  • Tunstall, Dwayne, Yes, but Not Quite: Encountering Josiah Royce’s Ethico-Religious Insight, New York: Fordham University Press, 2009.
  • Trotter, G., On Royce, Belmont, California: Wadsworth, 2001.

Author Information

Jacquelyn Ann K. Kegley
California State University Bakersfield
U. S. A.

Arthur Schopenhauer (1788—1860)

Arthur Schopenhauer has been dubbed the artist’s philosopher on account of the inspiration his aesthetics has provided to artists of all stripes. He is also known as the philosopher of pessimism, as he articulated a worldview that challenges the value of existence. His elegant and muscular prose earn him a reputation as one the greatest German stylists. Although he never achieved the fame of such post-Kantian philosophers as Johann Gottlieb Fichte and G.W.F. Hegel in his lifetime, his thought informed the work of such luminaries as Sigmund Freud, Ludwig Wittgenstein and, most famously, Friedrich Nietzsche. He is also known as the first German philosopher to incorporate Eastern thought into his writings.

Schopenhauer’s thought is iconoclastic for a number of reasons. Although he considered himself Kant’s only true philosophical heir, he argued that the world was essentially irrational. Writing in the era of German Romanticism, he developed an aesthetics that was classicist in its emphasis on the eternal. When German philosophers were entrenched in the universities and immersed in the theological concerns of the time, Schopenhauer was an atheist who stayed outside the academic profession.

Schopenhauer’s lack of recognition during most of his lifetime may have been due to the iconoclasm of his thought, but it was probably also partly due to his irascible and stubborn temperament. The diatribes against Hegel and Fichte peppered throughout his works provide evidence of his state of mind. Regardless of the reason Schopenhauer’s philosophy was overlooked for so long, he fully deserves the prestige he enjoyed altogether too late in his life.

Table of Contents

  1. Schopenhauer’s Life
  2. Schopenhauer’s Thought
    1. The World as Will and Representation
      1. Schopenhauer’s Metaphysics and Epistemology
      2. The Ideas and Schopenhauer’s Aesthetics
    2. The Human Will
      1. Agency and Freedom
      2. Ethics
  3. Schopenhauer’s Pessimism
  4. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources Available in English
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Schopenhauer’s Life

Arthur Schopenhauer was born on February 22, 1788 in Danzig (now Gdansk, Poland) to a prosperous merchant, Heinrich Floris Schopenhauer, and his much younger wife, Johanna. The family moved to Hamburg when Schopenhauer was five, because his father, a proponent of enlightenment and republican ideals, found Danzig unsuitable after the Prussian annexation. His father wanted Arthur to become a cosmopolitan merchant like himself and hence traveled with Arthur extensively in his youth. His father also arranged for Arthur to live with a French family for two years when he was nine, which allowed Arthur to become fluent in French. From an early age, Arthur wanted to pursue the life of a scholar. Rather than force him into his own career, Heinrich offered a proposition to Arthur: the boy could either accompany his parents on a tour of Europe, after which time he would apprentice with a merchant, or he could attend a gymnasium in preparation for attending university. Arthur chose the former option, and his witnessing firsthand on this trip the profound suffering of the poor helped shape his pessimistic philosophical worldview.

After returning from his travels, Arthur began apprenticing with a merchant in preparation for his career. When Arthur was 17 years old, his father died, most likely as a result of suicide. Upon his death, Arthur, his sister Adele, and his mother were each left a sizable inheritance. Two years following his father’s death, with the encouragement of his mother, Schopenhauer freed himself of his obligation to honor the wishes of his father, and he began attending a gymnasium in Gotha. He was an extraordinary pupil: he mastered Greek and Latin while there, but was dismissed from the school for lampooning a teacher.

In the meantime his mother, who was by all accounts not happy in the marriage, used her newfound freedom to move to Weimar and become engaged in the social and intellectual life of the city. She met with great success there, both as a writer and as a hostess, and her salon became the center of the intellectual life of the city with such luminaries as Johann Wolfgang von Goethe, the Schlegel brothers (Karl Wilhelm Friedrich and August Wilhelm), and Christoph Martin Wieland regularly in attendance. Johanna’s success had a bearing on Arthur’s future, for she introduced him to Goethe, which eventually led to their collaboration on a theory of colors. At one of his mother’s gatherings, Schopenhauer also met the Orientalist scholar Friedrich Majer, who stimulated in Arthur a lifelong interest in Eastern thought. At the same time, Johanna and Arthur never got along well: she found him morose and overly critical and he regarded her as a superficial social climber. The tensions between them reached its peak when Arthur was 30 years old, at which time she requested that he never contact her again.

Before his break with his mother, Arthur matriculated to the University of Göttingen in 1809, where he enrolled in the study of medicine. In his third semester at Göttingen, Arthur decided to dedicate himself to the study of philosophy, for in his words: “Life is an unpleasant business… I have resolved to spend mine reflecting on it.” Schopenhauer studied philosophy under the tutelage of Gottlieb Ernst Schultz, whose major work was a critical commentary of Kant’s system of transcendental idealism. Schultz insisted that Schopenhauer begin his study of philosophy by reading the works of Immanuel Kant and Plato, the two thinkers who became the most influential philosophers in the development of his own mature thought. Schopenhauer also began a study of the works of Friedrich Wilhelm Joseph von Schelling, of whose thought he became deeply critical.

Schopenhauer transferred to Berlin University in 1811 for the purpose of attending the lectures of Johann Gottlieb Fichte, who at the time was considered the most exciting and important German philosopher of his day. Schopenhauer also attended Friedrich Schleiermacher’s lectures, for Schleiermacher was regarded as a highly competent translator and commentator of Plato. Schopenhauer became disillusioned with both thinkers, and with university intellectual life in general, which he regarded as unnecessarily abstruse, removed from genuine philosophical concerns, and compromised by theological agendas.

Napoleon’s Grande Armee arrived in Berlin in 1813, and soon after Schopenhauer moved to Rudolstat, a small town near Weimar, in order to escape the political turmoil. There Schopenhauer wrote his doctoral dissertation, The Fourfold Root of the Principle of Sufficient Reason, in which he provided a systematic investigation of the principle of sufficient reason. He regarded his project as a response to Kant who, in delineating the categories, neglected to attend to the forms that ground them. The following year Schopenhauer settled in Dresden, hoping that the quiet bucolic surroundings and rich intellectual resources found there would foster the development of his philosophical system. Schopenhauer also began an intense study of Baruch Spinoza, whose notion of natura naturans, a notion that characterized nature as self-activity, became key to the formulation of his account of the will in his mature system.

During his time in Dresden, he wrote On Vision and Colors, the product of his collaboration with Goethe. In this work, he used Goethe’s theory as a starting point in order to provide a theory superior to that of his mentor. Schopenhauer’s relationship with Goethe became strained after Goethe became aware of the publication. During his time in Dresden, Schopenhauer dedicated himself to completing his philosophical system, a system that combined Kant’s transcendental idealism with Schopenhauer’s original insight that the will is the thing-in-itself. He published his major work that expounded this system, The World as Will and Representation, in December of 1818 (with a publication date of 1819). To Schopenhauer’s chagrin, the book made no impression on the public.

In 1820, Schopenhauer was awarded permission to lecture at the University of Berlin. He deliberately, and impudently, scheduled his lectures during the same hour as those of G.W.F. Hegel, who was the most distinguished member of the faculty. Only a handful of students attended Schopenhauer’s lectures while over 200 students attended the lectures of Hegel. Although he remained on the list of lecturers for many years in Berlin, no one showed any further interest in attending his lectures, which only fueled his contempt for academic philosophy.

The following decade was perhaps Schopenhauer’s darkest and least productive. Not only did he suffer from the lack of recognition that his groundbreaking philosophy received, but he also suffered from a variety illnesses. He attempted to make a career as a translator from French and English prose, but these attempts also met with little interest from the outside world. During this time Schopenhauer also lost a lawsuit to the seamstress Caroline Luise Marguet that began in 1821 and was settled five years later. Marguet accused Schopenhauer of beating and kicking her when she refused to leave the antechamber to his apartment. As a result of the suit, Schopenhauer had to pay her 60 thalers annually for the rest of her life.

In 1831, Schopenhauer fled Berlin because of a cholera epidemic (an epidemic that later took the life of Hegel) and settled in Frankfurt am Main, where he remained for the rest of his life. In Frankfurt, he again became productive, publishing a number of works that expounded various points in his philosophical system. He published On the Will in Nature in 1836, which explained how new developments in the physical sciences served as confirmation of his theory of the will. In 1839, he received public recognition for the first time, a prize awarded by the Norwegian Academy, on his essay, On the Freedom of the Human Will. In 1840 he submitted an essay entitled On the Basis of Morality to the Danish Academy, but was awarded no prize even though his essay was the only submission. In 1841, he published both essays under the title, The Fundamental Problems of Morality, and included an introduction that was little more than a scathing indictment of Danish Academy for failing to recognize the value of his insights.

Schopenhauer was able to publish an enlarged second edition to his major work in 1843, which more than doubled the size of the original edition. The new expanded edition earned Schopenhauer no more acclaim than the original work. He published a work of popular philosophical essays and aphorisms aimed at the general public in 1851 under the title, Parerga and Paralipomena (Secondary Works and Belated Observations). This work, the most unlikely of his books, earned him his fame, and from the most unlikely of places: a review written by the English scholar John Oxenford, entitled “Iconoclasm in German Philosophy,” which was translated into German. The review excited an interest in German readers, and Schopenhauer became famous virtually overnight. Schopenhauer spent the rest of his life reveling in his hard won and belated fame, and died in 1860.

2. Schopenhauer’s Thought

Schopenhauer’s philosophy stands apart from other German idealist philosophers in many respects. Perhaps most surprising for the first time reader of Schopenhauer familiar with the writings of other German idealists would be the clarity and elegance of his prose. Schopenhauer was an avid reader of the great stylists in England and France, and he tried to emulate their style in his own writings. Schopenhauer often charged more abstruse writers such as Fichte and Hegel with deliberate obfuscation, describing the latter as a scribbler of nonsense in his second edition of The Fourfold Root of the Principle of Sufficient Reason.

Schopenhauer’s philosophy also stands in contrast with his contemporaries insofar as his system remains virtually unchanged from its first articulation in the first edition of The World as Will and Representation. Even his dissertation, which he wrote before he recognized the role of the will in metaphysics, was incorporated into his mature system. For this reason, his thought has been arranged thematically rather than chronologically below.

a. The World as Will and Representation

i. Schopenhauer’s Metaphysics and Epistemology

The starting point for Schopenhauer’s metaphysics is Immanuel Kant’s system of transcendental idealism as explained in The Critique of Pure Reason. Although Schopenhauer is quite critical of much of the content of Kant’s Transcendental Analytic, he endorses Kant’s approach to metaphysics in Kant’s limiting the sphere of metaphysics to articulating the conditions of experience rather than transcending the bounds of experience. In addition, he accepts the results of the Transcendental Aesthetic, which demonstrate the truth of transcendental idealism. Like Kant, Schopenhauer argues that the phenomenal world is a representation, i.e., an object for the subject conditioned by the forms of our cognition. At the same time, Schopenhauer simplifies the activity of the Kantian cognitive apparatus by holding that all cognitive activity occurs according to the principle of sufficient reason, that is, that nothing is without a reason for being.

In Schopenhauer’s dissertation, which was published under the title The Fourfold Root of Sufficient Reason, he argues that all of our representations are connected according to one of the four manifestations of the principle of sufficient reason, each of which concerns a different class of objects. The principle of sufficient reason of becoming, which regards empirical objects, provides an explanation in terms of causal necessity: any material state presupposes a prior state from which it regularly follows. The principle of sufficient reason of knowing, which regards concepts or judgments, provides an explanation in terms of logical necessity: if a judgment is to be true, it must have a sufficient ground. Regarding the third branch of the principle, that of space and time, the ground for being is mathematical: space and time are so constituted that all their parts mutually determine one another. Finally, for the principle regarding willing, we require as a ground a motive, which is an inner cause for that which it was done. Every action presupposes a motive from which it follows by necessity.

Schopenhauer argues that prior philosophers, including Kant, have failed to recognize that the first manifestation and second manifestations are distinct, and subsequently tend to conflate logical grounds and causes. Moreover, philosophers have not heretofore recognized the principle’s operation in the realms of mathematics and human action. Thus Schopenhauer was confident that his dissertation not only would provide an invaluable corrective to prior accounts of the principle of sufficient reason, but would also allow every brand of explanation to acquire greater certainty and precision.

It should be noted that while Schopenhauer’s account of the principle of sufficient reason owes much to Kant’s account of the faculties, his account is significantly at odds with Kant’s in several ways. For Kant, the understanding always operates by means of concepts and judgments, and the faculties of understanding and reason are distinctly human (at least regarding those animate creatures with which we are familiar). Schopenhauer, however, asserts that the understanding is not conceptual and is a faculty that both animals and humans possess. In addition, Schopenhauer’s account of the fourth root of the principle of sufficient reason is at odds with Kant’s account of human freedom, for Schopenhauer argues that actions follow necessarily from their motives.

Schopenhauer incorporates his account of the principle of sufficient reason into the metaphysical system of his chief work, The World as Will and Representation. As we have seen, Schopenhauer, like Kant, holds that representations are always constituted by the forms of our cognition. However, Schopenhauer points out that there is an inner nature to phenomena that eludes the principle of sufficient reason. For example, etiology (the science of physical causes) describes the manner in which causality operates according to the principle of sufficient reason, but it cannot explain the natural forces that underlie and determine physical causality. All such forces remain, to use Schopenhauer’s term, “occult qualities.”

At the same time, there is one aspect of the world that is not given to us merely as representation, and that is our own bodies. We are aware of our bodies as objects in space and time, as a representation among other representations, but we also experience our bodies in quite a different way, as the felt experiences of our own intentional bodily motions (that is, kinesthesis). This felt awareness is distinct from the body’s spatio-temporal representation. Since we have insight into what we ourselves are aside from representation, we can extend this insight to every other representation as well. Thus, Schopenhauer concludes, the innermost nature [Innerste], the underlying force, of every representation and also of the world as a whole is the will, and every representation is an objectification of the will. In short, the will is the thing in itself. Thus Schopenhauer can assert that he has completed Kant’s project because he has successfully identified the thing in itself.

Although every representation is an expression of will, Schopenhauer denies that every item in the world acts intentionally or has consciousness of its own movements. The will is a blind, unconscious force that is present in all of nature. Only in its highest objectifications, that is, only in animals, does this blind force become conscious of its own activity. Although the conscious purposive striving that the term ‘will’ implies is not a fundamental feature of the will, conscious purposive striving is the manner in which we experience it and Schopenhauer chooses the term with this fact in mind.

Hence, the title of Schopenhauer’s major work, The World as Will and Representation, aptly summarizes his metaphysical system. The world is the world of representation, as a spatio-temporal universal of individuated objects, a world constituted by our own cognitive apparatus. At the same time, the inner being of this world, what is outside of our cognitive apparatus or what Kant calls the thing-in-itself, is the will; the original force manifested in every representation.

ii. The Ideas and Schopenhauer’s Aesthetics

Schopenhauer argues that space and time, which are the principles of individuation, are foreign to the thing-in-itself, for they are the modes of our cognition. For us, the will expresses itself in a variety of individuated beings, but the will in itself is an undivided unity. It is the same force at work in our own willing, in the movements of animals, of plants and of inorganic bodies.

Yet, if the world is composed of undifferentiated willing, why does this force manifest itself in such a vast variety of ways? Schopenhauer’s reply is that the will is objectified in a hierarchy of beings. At its lowest grade, we see the will objectified in natural forces, and at its highest grade the will is objectified in the species of human being. The phenomena of higher grades of the will are produced by conflicts occurring between different phenomena of the lower grades of the will, and in the phenomenon of the higher Idea, the lower grades are subsumed. For instance, the laws of chemistry and gravity continue to operate in animals, although such lower grades cannot explain fully their movements. Although Schopenhauer explains the grades of the will in terms of development, he insists that the gradations did not develop over time, for such an understanding would assume that time exists independently of our cognitive faculties. Thus in all natural beings we see the will expressing itself in its various objectifications. Schopenhauer identifies these objectifications with the Platonic Ideas for a number of reasons. They are outside of space and time, related to individual beings as their prototypes, and ontologically prior to the individual beings that correspond to them.

Although the laws of nature presuppose the Ideas, we cannot intuit the Ideas simply by observing the activities of nature, and this is due to the relation of the will to our representations. The will is the thing in itself, but our experience of the will, our representations, are constituted by our form of cognition, the principle of sufficient reason. The principle of sufficient reason produces the world of representation as a nexus of spatio-temporal, causally related entities. Therefore, Schopenhauer’s metaphysical system seems to preclude our having access to the Ideas as they are in themselves, or in a way that transcends this spatio-temporal causally related framework.

However, Schopenhauer asserts that there is a kind of knowing that is free from the principle of sufficient reason. To have knowledge that is not conditioned by our forms of cognition would be an impossibility for Kant. Schopenhauer makes such knowledge possible by distinguishing the conditions of knowing, namely, the principle of sufficient reason, from the condition for objectivity in general. To be an object for a subject is a condition of objects that is more basic than the principle of sufficient reason for Schopenhauer. Since the principle of sufficient reason allows us to experience objects as particulars existing in space and time with a causal relation to other things, to have an experience of an object solely insofar as it presents itself to a subject, apart from the principle of sufficient reason, is to experience an object that is neither spatio-temporal nor in a causal relation to other objects. Such objects are the Ideas, and the kind of cognition involved in perceiving them is aesthetic contemplation, for perception of the Ideas is the experience of the beautiful.

Schopenhauer argues that the ability to transcend the everyday point of view and regard objects of nature aesthetically is not available to most human beings. Rather, the ability to regard nature aesthetically is the hallmark of the genius, and Schopenhauer describes the content of art through an examination of genius. The genius, claims Schopenhauer, is one who has been given by nature a superfluity of intellect over will. For Schopenhauer, the intellect is designed to serve the will. Since in living organisms, the will manifests itself as the drive for self-preservation, the intellect serves individual organisms by regulating their relations with the external world in order to secure their self-preservation. Because the intellect is designed to be entirely in service of the will, it slumbers, to use Schopenhauer’s colorful metaphor, unless the will awakens it and sets it in motion. Therefore ordinary knowledge always concerns the relations, laid down by the principle of sufficient reason, of objects in terms of the demands of the will.

Although the intellect exists only to serve the will, in certain humans the intellect accorded by nature is so disproportionately large, it far exceeds the amount needed to serve the will. In such individuals, the intellect can break free of the will and act independently. A person with such an intellect is a genius (only men can have such a capability according to Schopenhauer), and this will-free activity is aesthetic contemplation or creation. The genius is thus distinguished by his ability to engage in will-less contemplation of the Ideas for a sustained period of time, which allows him to repeat what he has apprehended by creating a work of art. In producing a work of art, the genius makes the beautiful accessible for the non-genius as well. Whereas non-geniuses cannot intuit the Ideas in nature, they can intuit them in a work of art, for the artist replicates nature in the artwork in such a manner that the viewer is capable of viewing it disinterestedly, that is, freed from her own willing, as an Idea.

Schopenhauer states that aesthetic contemplation is characterized by objectivity. The intellect in its normal functioning is in the service of the will. As such, our normal perception is always tainted by our subjective strivings. The aesthetic point of view, since it is freed from such strivings, is more objective than any other ways of regarding an object. Art does not transport the viewer to an imaginary or even ideal realm. Rather it affords the opportunity to view life without the distorting influence of his own will.

b. The Human Will: Agency, Freedom, and Ethical Action

i. Agency and Freedom

Any account of human agency in Schopenhauer must be given in terms of his account of the will. For Schopenhauer, all acts of will are bodily movements, and thus are not the internal cause of bodily movements. What distinguishes an act of will from other events, which are also expressions of the will, is that it meets two criteria: it is a bodily movement caused by a motive, and it is accompanied by a direct awareness of this movement. Schopenhauer provides both a psychological and physiological account of motives. In his psychological account, motives are causes that occur in the medium of cognition, or internal causes. Motives are mental events that arise in response to an awareness of some motivating object. Schopenhauer argues that these mental events can never be desires or emotions: desires and emotions are expressions of the will and thus are not included under the class of representations. Rather, a motive is the awareness of some object of representation. These representations can be abstract; thinking the concept of an object, or intuitive; perceiving an object. Thus Schopenhauer provides a causal picture of action, and it is one in which mental events cause physical events.

In Schopenhauer’s physiological account of motives, motives are brain processes that cause certain neural activities and these translate into bodily motion. The psychological and physical accounts are consistent insofar as Schopenhauer has a dual-aspect view of the mental and physical. The mental and the physical are not two causally linked realms, but two aspects of the same nature, where one cannot be reduced to or explained by the other. It is important to underscore the fact that in the physiological account, the will is not a function of the brain. Rather it is present as irritability in the muscular fibers of the whole body.

According to Schopenhauer, the will, as muscular irritability, is a continual striving for activity in general. Because this striving has no direction, it aims at all directions at once and thus produces no physical movement. However, when the nervous system provides the direction for this movement (that is, when motives act on the will), the movement is given direction and bodily movement occurs. The nerves do not move the muscles, rather they provide the occasion for the muscles’ movements.

The causal mechanism in acts of will is necessary and lawful, as are all causal relations in Schopenhauer’s view. Acts of will follow from motives with the same necessity that the motion of a billiard ball follows from its being struck. Yet this account leads to a problem concerning the unpredictability of acts: if the causal process is law governed, and if acts of will are causally determined, Schopenhauer must account for the fact that human actions are unpredictable. This unpredictability of human action, he argues, is due to the impossibility of knowing comprehensively the character of an individual. Each character is unique, and thus it is impossible to predict fully how a motive or set of motives will effect bodily motion. In addition, we usually do not know what a person’s beliefs are concerning the motive, and these beliefs influence how she will respond to it. However, if we had a full account of a person’s character as well as her beliefs, we could with scientific accuracy predict what bodily motion would result from a particular motive.

Schopenhauer distinguishes between causation that occurs through stimuli, which is mechanistic, and that which occurs through motives. Each kind of causality occurs with necessity and lawfulness. The difference between these different classifications of causes regards the commensurability and proximity of cause and the effect, not their degree of lawfulness. In mechanical causation, the cause is contiguous and commensurate to the effect, both cause and effect are easily perceived, and therefore their causal lawfulness is clear. For instance, a billiard ball must be struck in order to move, and the force in which one ball hits will be equal to the force in which the other ball moves. In stimuli, causes are proximate: there is no separation between receiving the impression and being determined by it. At the same time, cause and effect are not always commensurate: for instance, when a plant reaches up to the sun, the sun as cause makes no motion to produce the effect of the plant’s movement. In motive causality, the cause is neither proximate nor commensurate: the memory of Helen can cause whole armies to run to battle, for instance. Consequently the lawfulness in motive causality is difficult, if not impossible, to perceive.

Because human action is causally determined, Schopenhauer denies that humans can freely choose how they respond to motives. In any course of events, one and only one course of action is available to the agent, and the agent performs that action with necessity. Schopenhauer must, then, account for the fact that agents experience their own actions as contingent. Moreover, he must account for the active nature of agency, the fact that agents experience their actions as things they do and not things that happen to them.

Schopenhauer gives an explanation of the active nature of agency, but not in terms of the causal efficacy of agents. Instead, the key to accounting for human agency lies in the distinction between one’s intelligible and empirical character. Our intelligible character is our character outside of space and time, and is the original force of the will. We cannot have access to our intelligible character, as it exists outside our forms of knowing. Like all forces in nature, it is original, inalterable and inexplicable. Our empirical character is our character insofar as it manifests itself in individual acts of will: it is, in short, the phenomenon of the intelligible character. The empirical character is an object of experience and thus tied to the forms of experience, namely space, time and causality.

However, the intelligible character is not determined by these forms, and thus is free. Schopenhauer calls this freedom transcendental, as it is outside the realm of experience. Although we can have no experience of our intelligible character, we do have some awareness of the fact that our actions issue from it and thus are very much our own. This awareness accounts for our experiencing our deeds as both original and spontaneous. Thus our deeds are both events linked with other events in a lawfully determined causal chain and acts that issue directly from our own characters. Our actions can embody both these otherwise contradictory characterizations because these characterizations refer to the deeds from two different aspects of our characters, the empirical and the intelligible.

Our characters also explain why we attribute moral responsibility to agents even though acts are causally necessitated. Characters determine the consequences that motives effect on our bodies. Yet, states Schopenhauer, our characters are entirely our own: our characters are fundamentally what we are. This is why we assign praise or blame not to acts but to the agents who commit them. And this is why we hold ourselves responsible: not because we could have acted differently given who we are, but that we could have been different from who we are. Although there is not freedom in our action, there is freedom in our essence, our intelligible character, insofar as our essence lies outside the forms of our cognition, that is to say, space, time and causality.

ii. Ethics

Like Kant, Schopenhauer reconciles freedom and necessity in human action through the distinction between the phenomenal and noumenal realms. However, he was sharply critical of Kant’s deontological framework. Schopenhauer charged Kant with committing a petitio principii, for he assumed at the outset of his ethics that purely moral laws and then constructed an ethics to account for such laws. Schopenhauer argues, however, that Kant provides no proof for the existence of such laws. Indeed, Schopenhauer avers that no such laws, which have their basis in theological assumptions, exist. Likewise, Schopenhauer attacks Kant’s account of morality as characterized by an unconditioned ought. The notion of ‘ought’ only carries motivational force when accompanied by the threat of sanctions. Because no ought can be unconditioned insofar as its motivational force stems from its implicit threat of punishment, all imperatives are in fact, according to Schopenhauer, hypothetical.

Nor does Schopenhauer accept Kant’s claim that morality derives from reason: like David Hume, Schopenhauer regards reason as instrumental. The origins of morality are not found in reason, but rather in the feeling of compassion that allows one to transcend the standpoint of egoism. The dictum of morality is “Harm no one and help others as much as you can.” Most persons operate exclusively from egoistic motives, for, as Schopenhauer explains, our knowledge of our own weal and woe is direct, while our knowledge of the weal and woe of others is always only representation and thus does not affect us.

Although most persons are motivated primarily by egoistic concerns, certain rare persons can act from compassion, and it is compassion that forms the basis of Schopenhauer’s ethics. Compassion is prompted by the awareness of the suffering of another person, and Schopenhauer characterizes it as a kind of felt knowledge. Compassion is born of the awareness that individuation is merely phenomenal. Consequently the ethical point of view expresses a deeper knowledge than what is found in the ordinary manner of viewing the world. Indeed, the feeling of compassion is nothing other than the felt knowledge that the suffering of another has a reality equal to one’s own suffering insofar as the world in itself is an undifferentiated unity. Schopenhauer asserts that this knowledge cannot be taught or even communicated, but can only be brought about by experience.

Since compassion is the basis of Schopenhauer’s ethics, the ethical significance of conduct is found in the motive alone, an aspect of his ethics that finds affinity with Kant. Thus Schopenhauer distinguishes the just person from the good person not by the nature of their actions, but by their level of compassion: the just person sees through the principle of individuation enough to avoid causing harm to another, whereas the good person sees through it even further, to the point that the suffering he sees in others touches him almost as closely as does his own. Such a person not only avoids harming others, but actively tries to alleviate the suffering of others. At its highest point, someone may recognize the suffering of others with such clarity that he is willing to sacrifice his own well-being for the sake of others, if by doing so the suffering he will alleviate outweighs the suffering he must endure. This, says Schopenhauer, is the highest point in ethical conduct.

3. Schopenhauer’s Pessimism

Schopenhauer’s pessimism is the most well known feature of his philosophy, and he is often referred to as the philosopher of pessimism. Schopenhauer’s pessimistic vision follows from his account of the inner nature of the world as aimless blind striving.

Because the will has no goal or purpose, the will’s satisfaction is impossible. The will objectifies itself in a hierarchy of gradations from inorganic to organic life, and every grade of objectification of the will, from gravity to animal motion, is marked by insatiable striving. In addition, every force of nature and every organic form of nature participates in a struggle to seize matter from other forces or organisms. Thus existence is marked by conflict, struggle and dissatisfaction.

The attainment of a goal or desire, Schopenhauer continues, results in satisfaction, whereas the frustration of such attainment results in suffering. Since existence is marked by want or deficiency, and since satisfaction of this want is unsustainable, existence is characterized by suffering. This conclusion holds for all of nature, including inanimate natures, insofar as they are at essence will. However, suffering is more conspicuous in the life of human beings because of their intellectual capacities. Rather than serving as a relief from suffering, the intellect of human beings brings home their suffering with greater clarity and consciousness. Even with the use of reason, human beings can in no way alter the degree of misery we experience; indeed, reason only magnifies the degree to which we suffer. Thus all the ordinary pursuits of mankind are not only fruitless but also illusory insofar as they are oriented toward satisfying an insatiable, blind will.

Since the essence of existence is insatiable striving, and insatiable striving is suffering, Schopenhauer concludes that nonexistence is preferable to existence. However, suicide is not the answer. One cannot resolve the problem of existence through suicide, for since all existence is suffering, death does not end one’s suffering but only terminates the form that one’s suffering takes. The proper response to recognizing that all existence is suffering is to turn away from or renounce one’s own desiring. In this respect, Schopenhauer’s thought finds confirmation in the Eastern texts he read and admired: the goal of human life is to turn away from desire. Salvation can only be found in resignation.

4. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources Available in English

  • Manuscript Remains in Four Volumes. Edited by Arthur Hübscher, Translated by E.F.J. Payne. Oxford: Berg Publishers, 1988.
  • On the Fourfold Root of the Principle of Sufficient Reason. Translated by E.F.J. Payne. LaSalle: Open Court Press, 1997.
  • On the Basis of Morality. Translated by E.F.J. Payne. Indianapolis: The Bobbs Merrill Company, 1965.
  • On the Will in Nature. Translated by E.F.J. Payne, Edited by David Cartwright. New York: Berg Publishers, 1992.
  • Parerga and Paralipomena Volumes 1 and II. Translated by E.F.J. Payne. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2000.
  • Prize Essay on the Freedom of the Will. Edited by Gunther Zoller, Translated by E.F. J. Payne. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1999.
  • The World as Will and Representation. Translated by E.F.J. Payne, 2 vols. New York: Dover, 1969.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Atwell, John E. Schopenhauer: The Human Character . Philadelphia: Temple University Press, 1990.
    • Provides a lucid account of Schopenhauer’s ethics and pessimism.
  • Atwell, John E. Schopenhauer on the Character of the World: The Metaphysics of Will. Berkeley: University of California Press, 1995.
    • An excellent and comprehensive account of Schopenhauer’s metaphysics and epistemology that brings new insight into Schopenhauer’s methodology.
  • Cartwright, David E. Schopenhauer: A Biography. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2010.
    • The most comprehensive biography of Schopenhauer available in English.
  • Copleston, Frederick. Arthur Schopenhauer, Philosopher of Pessimism. London: Barnes and Noble, 1975.
    • The first book length monograph on Schopenhauer written in English.
  • Hamlyn, D.W. Schopenhauer. London: Routledge & Kegan Paul, 1980.
    • A brief but substantive critical analysis of his thought that includes a strong summary of his dissertation as well as his relationship to Kant.
  • Hübscher, Arthur, The Philosophy of Schopenhauer in Its Intellectual Context: Thinker Against the Tide. Translated by Joachim T. Baer and David E. Cartwright. Lewiston, N.Y : Edwin Mellon Press, 1989.
    • An excellent intellectual biography, extensively covers his earliest (pre-dissertation) thought and the influences of German romanticism and idealism.
  • Jacquette, Dale, ed. Schopenhauer, Philosophy, and the Arts. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996.
    • A collection of essays on both Schopenhauer’s aesthetics and the influence his aesthetics had on later artists.
  • Janaway, Christopher, ed. Willing and Nothingness: Schopenhauer as Nietzsche’s Educator. Oxford; Clarendon Press, 1998.
    • These essays explore Schopenhauer’s influence on Nietzsche. The book includes a complete list of textual references to Schopenhauer in Nietzsche’s writings.
  • Magee, Bryan. The Philosophy of Schopenhauer. Oxford: Carendon Press, 1983.
    • Covers the whole of Schopenhauer’s thought, as well as an extensive account on his influence on later thinkers and artists such as Wagner and Wittgenstein.
  • Safranski, Ruediger, Schopenhauer and the Wild Years of Philosophy. Translated by Ewald Osers, London: Weidenfeld and Nicolson, 1989.
    • An entertaining biography that provides insight into the political and cultural milieu in which Schopenhauer developed his thought.
  • Young, Julian, Willing and Unwilling: A Study in the Philosophy of Arthur Schopenhauer. Dordrecht: Martinus Nijhoff, 1987.
    • An influential reading of Schopenhauer’s work, which argues that Schopenhauer’s account of the thing-in-itself cannot be wholly identified with the will.

Author Information

Mary Troxell
Boston College
U. S. A.

Michel de Montaigne (1533—1592)

MontaigneMichel de Montaigne is widely appreciated as one of the most important figures in the late French Renaissance, both for his literary innovations as well as for his contributions to philosophy.  As a writer, he is credited with having developed a new form of literary expression, the essay, a brief and admittedly incomplete treatment of a topic germane to human life that blends philosophical insights with historical anecdotes and autobiographical details, all unapologetically presented from the author’s own personal perspective.  As a philosopher, he is best known for his skepticism, which profoundly influenced major figures in the history of philosophy such as Descartes and Pascal.

All of his literary and philosophical work is contained in his Essays, which he began to write in 1572 and first published in 1580 in the form of two books.  Over the next twelve years leading up to his death, he made additions to the first two books and completed a third, bringing the work to a length of about one thousand pages.  While Montaigne made numerous additions to the book over the years, he never deleted or removed any material previously published, in an effort to represent accurately the changes that he underwent both as a thinker and as a person over the twenty years during which he wrote.  These additions add to the unsystematic character of the book, which Montaigne himself claimed included many contradictions.  It is no doubt due to the unsystematic nature of the Essays that Montaigne received relatively little attention from Anglo-American philosophers in the twentieth century.  Nonetheless, in recent years he has been held out by many as an important figure in the history of philosophy not only for his skepticism, but also for his treatment of topics such as the self, moral relativism, politics, and the nature of philosophy.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. The Philosophical Project of the Essays
  3. Skepticism
  4. Relativism
  5. Moral and Political Philosophy
  6. Influence
  7. References and Further Reading
    1. Selected editions of Montaigne’s Essays in French and English
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Life

Michel Eyquem de Montaigne was born at the Château Montaigne, located thirty miles east of Bordeaux, in 1533.  His father, Pierre Eyquem, was a wealthy merchant of wine and fish whose grandfather had purchased in 1477 what was then known as the Montaigne estate.  Montaigne’s mother, Antoinette de Loupes de Villeneuve, came from a  wealthy marrano family that had settled in Toulouse at the end of the 15th century.  Montaigne describes Eyquem as “the best father that ever was,” and mentions him often in the Essays.  Montaigne’s mother, on the other hand, is almost totally absent from her son’s book.  Amidst the turbulent religious atmosphere of sixteenth century France, Eyquem and his wife raised their children Catholic.  Michel, the eldest of eight children, remained a member of the Catholic Church his entire life, though three of his siblings became Protestants.

Eyquem, who had become enamored of novel pedagogical methods that he had discovered as a soldier in Italy, directed Montaigne’s unusual education.  As an infant, Montaigne was sent to live with a poor family in a nearby village so as to cultivate in him a natural devotion to “that class of men that needs our help.”  When Montaigne returned as a young child to live at the château, Eyquem arranged that Michel awake every morning to music.  He then hired a German tutor to teach Montaigne to speak Latin as his native tongue.  Members of the household were forbidden to speak to the young Michel in any language other than Latin, and, as a result, Montaigne reports that he was six years old before he learned any French.  It was at this time that Eyquem sent Montaigne to attend the prestigious Collège de Guyenne, where he studied under the Scottish humanist George Buchanan.

The details of Montaigne’s life between his departure from the Collège at age thirteen and his appointment as a Bordeaux magistrate in his early twenties are largely unknown.  He is thought to have studied the law, perhaps at Toulouse.  In any case, by 1557 he had begun his career as a magistrate, first in the Cour des Aides de Périgueux, a court with sovereign jurisdiction in the region over cases concerning taxation, and later in the Bordeaux Parlement, one of the eight parlements that together composed the highest court of justice in France.  There he encountered Etienne La Boétie, with whom he formed an intense friendship that lasted until La Boétie’s sudden death in 1563.  Years later, the bond he shared with La Boétie would inspire one of Montaigne’s best-known essays, “Of Friendship.”  Two years after La Boétie’s death Montaigne married Françoise de la Chassaigne.  His relationship with his wife seems to have been amiable but cool; it lacked the spiritual and intellectual connection that Montaigne had shared with La Boétie.  Their marriage produced six children, but only one survived infancy: a daughter named Léonor.

In 1570 Montaigne sold his office in the Parlement, and retreated to his château, where in 1571 he announced his retirement from public life.  Less than a year later he began to write his Essays.  Retirement did not mean isolation, however.  Montaigne made many trips to court in Paris between 1570 and 1580, and it seems that at some point between 1572 and 1576 he attempted to mediate between the ultra-conservative Catholic Henri de Guise and the Protestant Henri, king of Navarre.  Nonetheless, he devoted a great deal of time to writing, and in 1580 published the first two books of his Essays.

Soon thereafter Montaigne departed on a trip to Rome via Germany and Switzerland.  Montaigne recorded the trip in the Journal de Voyage, which was published for the first time in the 18th century, not having been intended for publication by Montaigne himself.   Among the reasons for his trip were his hope of finding relief from his kidney stones in the mineral baths of Germany, his desire to see Rome, and his general love of travel.  The trip lasted about fifteen months, and would have lasted longer had he not been called back to Bordeaux in 1581 to serve as mayor.

Montaigne’s first two-year term as mayor was mostly uneventful.  His second term was much busier, as the death of the Duke of Anjou made the Protestant Henri de Navarre heir to the French throne.  This resulted in a three-way conflict between the reigning Catholic King Henri III, Henri de Guise, leader of the conservative Catholic League, and Henri de Navarre.  Bordeaux, which remained Catholic during the religious wars that engulfed France for most of the 16th century, found itself in close proximity to Navarre’s Protestant forces in southwest France.  As a mayor loyal to the king, Montaigne worked successfully to keep the peace among the interested parties, protecting the city from seizure by the League while also maintaining diplomatic relations with Navarre.   As a moderate Catholic, he was well-regarded by both the king and Navarre, and after his tenure as mayor Montaigne continued to serve as a diplomatic link between the two parties, at one point in 1588 traveling to Paris on a secret diplomatic mission for Navarre.

In 1588, Montaigne published the fifth edition of the Essays, including a third book with material he had produced in the previous two years.  It is a copy of this fifth edition (known as the “Bordeaux Copy”), including the marginalia penned by Montaigne himself in the years leading up to his death, which in the eyes of most scholars constitutes the definitive text of the Essays today.  The majority of the last three years of his life were spent at the château.  When Navarre succeeded Henri III as king of France in 1589, he invited Montaigne to join him at court, but Montaigne was too ill to travel.  His body was failing him, and he died less than two years later, on September 13, 1592.

2. The Philosophical Project of the Essays


All of Montaigne’s philosophical reflections are found in his Essays.  To contemporary readers, the term “essay” denotes a particular literary genre.  But when Montaigne gives the title Essays to his book, he does not intend to designate the literary genre of the work so much as to refer to the spirit in which it is written and the nature of the project out of which it emerges.  The term is taken from the French verb “essayer,” which  Montaigne employs in a variety of senses throughout his book, where it carries such meanings as “to attempt,” “to test,” “to exercise,” and “to experiment.”  Each of these expressions captures an aspect of Montaigne’s project in the Essays.  To translate the title of his book as “Attempts” would capture the modesty of Montaigne’s essays, while to translate it as “Tests” would reflect the fact that he takes himself to be testing his judgment.  “Exercises” would communicate the sense in which essaying is a way of working on oneself, while “Experiments” would convey the exploratory spirit of the book.

The Essays is a decidedly unsystematic work.  The text itself is composed of 107 chapters or essays on a wide range of topics, including - to name a few -  knowledge, education, love, the body, death, politics, the nature and power of custom, and the colonization of the New World.  There rarely seems to be any explicit connection between one chapter and the next.  Moreover, chapter titles are often only tangentially related to their contents.  The lack of logical progression from one chapter to the next creates a sense of disorder that is compounded by Montaigne’s style, which can be described as deliberately nonchalant.  Montaigne intersperses reportage of historical anecdotes and autobiographical remarks throughout the book, and most essays include a number of digressions.  In some cases the digressions seem to be due to Montaigne’s stream-of-consciousness style,  while in others they are the result of his habit of inserting additions (sometimes just a sentence or two, other times a number of paragraphs) into essays years after they were first written.  Finally, the nature of Montaigne’s project itself contributes to the disorderly style of his book.  Part of that project, he tells us at the outset, is to paint a portrait of himself in words, and for Montaigne, this task is complicated by the conception he has of the nature of the self.  In “Of repentance,” for example, he announces that while others try to form man, he simply tells of a particular man, one who is constantly changing:

I cannot keep my subject still.  It goes along befuddled and staggering, with a natural drunkenness.  I take it in this condition, just as it is at the moment I give my attention to it.  I do not portray being: I portray passing….  I may presently change, not only by chance, but also by intention.  This is a record of various and changeable occurrences, and of irresolute and, when it so befalls, contradictory ideas: whether I am different myself, or whether I take hold of my subjects in different circumstances and aspects.  So, all in all, I may indeed contradict myself now and then; but truth, as Demades said, I do not contradict. (F 610)

Given Montaigne’s expression of this conception of the self as a fragmented and ever-changing entity, it should come as no surprise that we find contradictions throughout the Essays.  Indeed, one of the apparent contradictions in Montaigne’s thought concerns his view of the self.  While on the one hand he expresses the conception of the self outlined in the passage above, in the very same essay - as if to illustrate the principle articulated above - he asserts that his self is unified by his judgment, which has remained essentially the same his entire life.  Such apparent contradictions, in addition to Montaigne’s style and the structure that he gives his book, complicate the task of reading the Essays and have understandably led to diverse interpretations of its contents.

The stated purposes of Montaigne’s essays are almost as diverse as their contents.  In addition to the pursuit of self-knowledge, Montaigne also identifies the cultivation of his judgment and the presentation of a new ethical and philosophical figure to the reading public as fundamental goals of his project. There are two components to Montaigne’s pursuit of self-knowledge.  The first is the attempt to understand the human condition in general.  This involves reflecting on the beliefs, values, and behavior of human beings as represented both in literary, historical, and philosophical texts, and in his own experience.  The second is to understand himself as a particular human being.  This involves recording and reflecting upon his own idiosyncratic tastes, habits, and dispositions.  Thus in the Essays one finds a great deal of historical and autobiographical content, some of which seems arbitrary and insignificant.  Yet for Montaigne, there is no detail that is insignificant when it comes to understanding ourselves: “each particle, each occupation, of a man betrays and reveals him just as well as any other” (F 220).

A second aim of essaying himself is to cultivate his judgment.  For Montaigne, “judgment” refers to all of our intellectual faculties as well as to the particular acts of the intellect; in effect, it denotes the interpretive lens through which we view the world.  In essaying himself, he aims to cultivate his judgment in a number of discrete but related ways.  First, he aims to transform customary or habitual judgments into reflective judgments by calling them into question.  In a well-known passage from “Of custom, and not easily changing an accepted law,” Montaigne discusses how habit “puts to sleep the eye of our judgment.”  To “wake up” his judgment from its habitual slumber, Montaigne must call into question those beliefs, values, and judgments that ordinarily go unquestioned.  By doing so, he is able to determine whether or not they are justifiable, and so whether to take full ownership of them or to abandon them.  In this sense we can talk of Montaigne essaying, or testing, his judgment.  We find clear examples of this in essays such as “Of drunkenness” and “Of the resemblance of children to their fathers,” where he tests his pre-reflective attitudes toward drunkenness and doctors, respectively.  Another aspect of the cultivation of judgment has to do with exercising it through simple practice.  Thus Montaigne writes that in composing his essays, he is presenting his judgment with opportunities to exercise itself:

Judgment is a tool to use on all subjects, and comes in everywhere.  Therefore in the tests (essais) that I make of it here, I use every sort of occasion.  If it is a subject I do not understand at all, even on that I essay my judgment, sounding the ford from a good distance; and then, finding it too deep for my height, I stick to the bank.  And this acknowledgment that I cannot cross over is a token of its action, indeed one of those it is most proud of.  Sometimes in a vain and nonexistent subject I try (j’essaye) to see if [my judgment] will find the wherewithal to give it body, prop it up, and support it.  Sometimes I lead it to a noble and well-worn subject in which it has nothing original to discover, the road being so beaten that it can only walk in others’ footsteps.  There it plays its part by choosing the way that seems best to it, and of a thousand paths it says that this one or that was the most wisely chosen.  (F 219)

The third fundamental goal of essaying himself is to present his unorthodox way of living and thinking to the reading public of 16th century France.  He often remarks his intense desire to make himself and his unusual ways known to others.  Living in a time of war and intolerance, in which men were concerned above all with honor and their appearance in the public sphere, Montaigne presents his own way of life as an attractive alternative.  While he supports the monarchy and the Catholic Church, his support is measured and he is decidedly tolerant of other views and other ways of life (see, for example, “Of Cato the Younger”).  He vehemently opposes the violent and cruel behavior of many of the supporters of the Catholic cause, and recognizes the humanity of those who oppose them.  Espousing an openness antithetical to contemporary conventions, he openly declares his faults and failures, both moral and intellectual.  Finally, he emphasizes the values of private life and the fact that the true test of one’s character is how one behaves in private, not how one behaves in public.  In other words, Montaigne challenges the martial virtues of the day that he believes have led to cruelty, hypocrisy, and war, by presenting himself as an example of the virtues of gentleness, openness, and compromise.

Just as Montaigne presents his ways of life in the ethical and political spheres as alternatives to the ways common among his contemporaries, so he presents his ways of behaving in the intellectual sphere as alternatives to the common ways of thinking found among the learned.  He consistently challenges the Aristotelian authority that governed the universities of his day, emphasizing the particular over the universal, the concrete over the abstract, and experience over reason.  Rejecting the form as well as the content of academic philosophy, he abandons the rigid style of the medieval quaestio for the meandering and disordered style of the essay.  Moreover, he devalues the faculty of memory, so cultivated by renaissance orators and educators, and places good judgment in its stead as the most important intellectual faculty.  Finally, Montaigne emphasizes the personal nature of philosophy, and the value of self-knowledge over metaphysics.  His concern is always with the present, the concrete, and the human.

Rather than discursively arguing for the value of his ways of being, both moral and intellectual, Montaigne simply presents them to his readers:

These are my humors and my opinions; I offer them as what I believe, not what is to be believed.  I aim here only at revealing myself, who will perhaps be different tomorrow, if I learn something new which changes me.  I have no authority to be believed, nor do I want it, feeling myself too ill-instructed to instruct others. (F 108)

Yet while he disavows authority, he admits that he presents this portrait of himself in the hopes that others may learn from it (“Of practice”).  Thus the end of essaying himself is simultaneously private and public.  Montaigne desires to know himself, and to cultivate his judgment, and yet at the same time he seeks to offer his ways of life as salutary alternatives to those around him.

3. Skepticism

Montaigne is perhaps best known among philosophers for his skepticism.  Just what exactly his skepticism amounts to has been the subject of considerable scholarly debate.  Given the fact that he undoubtedly draws inspiration for his skepticism from his studies of the ancients, the tendency has been for scholars to locate him in one of the ancient skeptical traditions.  While some interpret him as a modern Pyrrhonist, others have emphasized what they take to be the influence of the Academics.  Still other scholars have argued that while there are clearly skeptical moments in his thought, characterizing Montaigne as a skeptic fails to capture the nature of Montaigne’s philosophical orientation.  Each of these readings captures an aspect of Montaigne’s thought, and consideration of the virtues of each of them in turn provides us with a fairly comprehensive view of Montaigne’s relation to the various philosophical positions that we tend to identify as “skeptical.”

The Pyrrhonian skeptics, according to Sextus Empiricus’ Outlines of Pyrrhonism, use skeptical arguments to bring about what they call equipollence between opposing beliefs.  Once they recognize two mutually exclusive and equipollent arguments for and against a certain belief, they have no choice but to suspend judgment.  This suspension of judgment, they say, is followed by tranquility, or peace of mind, which is the goal of their philosophical inquiry.

In “Apology for Raymond Sebond,” Montaigne expresses great admiration for the Pyrrhonists and their ability to maintain the freedom of their judgment by avoiding commitment to any particular theoretical position.  We find him employing the skeptical tropes introduced by Sextus in order to arrive at equipollence and then the suspension of judgment concerning a number of theoretical issues, from the nature of the divine to the veracity of perception.  In other essays, such as the very first essay of his book, ”By diverse means we arrive at the same end,” Montaigne employs skeptical arguments to bring about the suspension of judgment concerning practical matters, such as whether the best way to obtain mercy is by submission or defiance.  Introducing historical examples that speak for each of the two positions, he concludes that “truly man is a marvelously vain, diverse, and undulating object.  It is hard to found any constant and uniform judgment on him” (F 5).   We cannot arrive at any certain conclusion regarding practical matters any more than we can regarding theoretical matters.

If there are equipollent arguments for and against any practical course of action, however, we might wonder how Montaigne is to avoid the practical paralysis that would seem to follow from the suspension of judgment.  Here Sextus tells us that Pyrrhonists do not suffer from practical paralysis because they allow themselves to be guided by the way things seem to them, all the while withholding assent regarding the veracity of these appearances.  Thus Pyrrhonists are guided by passive acceptance of what Sextus calls the “fourfold observances”: guidance by nature, necessitation by feelings, the handing down of laws and customs, and the teaching of kinds of expertise.  The Pyrrhonist, then, having no reason to oppose what seems evident to her, will seek food when hungry, avoid pain, abide by local customs, and consult experts when necessary – all without holding any theoretical opinions or beliefs.

In certain cases, Montaigne seems to abide by the fourfold observances himself.  At one point in ”Apology for Raymond Sebond,” for instance, he seems to suggest that his allegiance to the Catholic Church is due to the fact that he was raised Catholic and Catholicism is the traditional religion of his country.  In other words, it appears that his behavior is the result of adherence to the fourfold observances of Sextus.  This has led some scholars, most notably Richard Popkin, to interpret him as a skeptical fideist who is arguing that because we have no reasons to abandon our customary beliefs and practices, we should remain loyal to them.  Indeed, Catholics would employ this argument in the Counter-Reformation movement of the sixteenth and seventeenth centuries.  (Nonetheless, the Essays would also come to be placed on the Catholic Church’s Index of Prohibited Books in the late seventeenth century, where it would remain for nearly two hundred years.)

Yet, for all the affinities between Montaigne and the Pyrrhonists, he does not always suspend judgment, and he does not take tranquility to be the goal of his philosophical inquiry.  Thus Montaigne at times appears to have more in common with the Academic Skeptics than with the Pyrrhonists.  For the Academics, at certain points in the history of their school, seem to have allowed for admitting that some judgments are more probable or justified than others, thereby permitting themselves to make judgments, albeit with a clear sense of their fallibility.  Another hallmark of Academic Skepticism was the strategy of dialectically assuming the premises of their interlocutors in order to show that they lead to conclusions at odds with the interlocutors’ beliefs.  Montaigne seems to employ this argumentative strategy in the “Apology for Raymond Sebond.” There Montaigne dialectically accepts the premises of Sebond’s critics in order to reveal the presumption and confusion involved in their objections to Sebond’s project.  For example, Montaigne shows that according to the understanding of knowledge held by Sebond’s secular critics, there can be no knowledge.  This is not the dogmatic conclusion that it has appeared to be to some scholars, since Montaigne’s conclusion is founded upon a premise that he himself clearly rejects.  If we understand knowledge as Sebond’s critics do, then there can be no knowledge.  But there is no reason why we must accept their notion of knowledge in the first place.  In this way, just as the Academic Skeptics argued that their Stoic opponents ought to suspend judgment, given the Stoic principles to which they subscribe, so Montaigne shows that Sebond’s secular critics must suspend judgment, given the epistemological principles that they claim to espouse.

While many scholars, then, justifiably speak of Montaigne as a modern skeptic in one sense or another, there are others who emphasize aspects of his thought that separate him from the skeptical tradition.  Such scholars point out that many interpretations of Montaigne as a fundamentally skeptical philosopher tend to focus on “Apology for Raymond Sebond,” Montaigne’s most skeptical essay.  When we take a broader view of the Essays as a whole, we find that Montaigne’s employment of skeptical tropes is fairly limited and that for Montaigne, strengthening his judgment – one of his avowed goals in the Essays – does not amount to learning how to eliminate his beliefs.  While working on his judgment often involves setting opinions against each other, it also often culminates in a judgment regarding the truth of these opinions.  Thus Ann Hartle, for instance, has argued that Montaigne’s thought is best understood as dialectical.  In a similar vein, Hugo Friedrich has pointed out that Montaigne’s skepticism is not fundamentally destructive.  According to Friedrich, in cataloguing the diversity of human opinions and practices Montaigne does not wish to eliminate our beliefs but rather to display the fullness of reality.

Interpreting Montaigne as a skeptic, then, requires a good deal of qualification.  While he does suspend judgment concerning certain issues, and he does pit opinions and customs against one another in order to undermine customary ways of thinking and behaving, his skepticism is certainly not systematic.  He does not attempt to suspend judgment universally, and he does not hesitate to maintain metaphysical beliefs that he knows he cannot justify.  Thus the spirit of his skepticism is not characterized by principles such as “I suspend judgment,” or “Nothing can be known,” but rather, by his motto, the question “What do I know?”  Moreover, as Montaigne demonstrates, constantly essaying oneself does lead one to become more diffident of his or her judgment.  Montaigne’s remarks are almost always prefaced by acknowledgments of their fallibility: “I like these words, which soften and moderate the rashness of our propositions: ‘perhaps,’ ‘to some extent,’ ‘some,’ ‘they say,’ ‘I think,’ and the like” (F 788).  But it does not necessarily lead one to the epistemological anxiety or despair characteristic of modern forms of skepticism.  Rather than despairing at his ignorance and seeking to escape it at all costs, he wonders at it and takes it to be an essential part of the self-portrait that is his Essays.  Moreover, he considers the clear-sighted recognition of his ignorance an accomplishment insofar as it represents a victory over the presumption that he takes to be endemic to the human condition.

4. Relativism

One of the primary targets of Montaigne’s skeptical attack against presumption is ethnocentrism, or the belief that one’s culture is superior to others and therefore is the standard against which all other cultures, and their moral beliefs and practices, should be measured.  This belief in the moral and cultural superiority of one’s own people, Montaigne finds, is widespread.  It seems to be the default belief of all human beings.  The first step toward undermining this prejudice is to display the sheer multiplicity of human beliefs and practices.  Thus, in essays such as “Of some ancient customs,” “Of Custom, and not easily changing an accepted law,” and “Apology for Raymond Sebond” Montaigne catalogues the variety of behaviors to be found in the world in order to draw attention to the contingency of his own cultural norms.  By reporting many customs that are direct inversions of contemporary European customs, he creates something like an inverted world for his readers, stunning their judgment by forcing them to question which way is up: here men urinate standing up and women do so sitting down; elsewhere it is the opposite.  Here incest is frowned upon; in other cultures it is the norm.  Here we bury our dead; there they eat them.  Here we believe in the immortality of the soul; in other societies such a belief is nonsense.

Montaigne is not terribly optimistic about reforming the prejudices of his contemporaries, for simply reminding them of the apparent contingency of their own practices in most cases will not be enough.  The power of custom over our habits and beliefs, he argues, is stronger than we tend to recognize.  Indeed, Montaigne devotes almost as much time in the Essays to discussing the power of custom to shape the way we see the world as he does to revealing the various customs that he has come across in his reading and his travels.  Custom, whether personal or social, puts to sleep the eye of our judgment, thereby tightening its grip over us, since its effects can only be diminished through deliberate and self-conscious questioning.  It begins to seem as if it is impossible to escape custom’s power over our judgment: “Each man calls barbarism whatever is not his own practice; for indeed it seems we have no other test of truth and reason than the example and pattern of the opinions and customs of the country we live in” (F 152).

Montaigne’s concern with custom and cultural diversity, combined with his rejection of ethnocentrism, has led many scholars to argue that Montaigne is a moral relativist, that is, that he holds that that there is no objective moral truth and that therefore moral values are simply expressions of conventions that enjoy widespread acceptance at a given time and place.  Yet Montaigne never explicitly expresses his commitment to moral relativism, and there are aspects of the Essays that seem to contradict such an interpretation, as other scholars have noted.

These other scholars are inclined to interpret Montaigne as committed to moral objectivism, or the theory that there is in fact objective moral truth, and they point to a number of aspects of the Essays that would support such an interpretation.  First, Montaigne does not hesitate to criticize the practices of other cultures.  For instance, in “Of cannibals,” after praising the virtues of the cannibals, he criticizes them for certain behaviors that he identifies as morally vicious.  For a relativist, such criticism would be unintelligible: if there is no objective moral truth, it makes little sense to criticize others for having failed to abide by it.  Rather, since there is no external standard by which to judge other cultures, the only logical course of action is to pass over them in silence. Then there are moments when Montaigne seems to refer to categorical duties, or moral obligations that are not contingent upon either our own preferences or cultural norms (see, for example, the conclusion of “Of cruelty”).  Finally, Montaigne sometimes seems to allude to the existence of objective moral truth, for instance in “Of some verses of Virgil” and “Of the useful and the honorable,” where he distinguishes between relative and absolute values.

Thus Montaigne’s position regarding moral relativism remains the subject of scholarly dispute.  What is not a matter of dispute, however, is that Montaigne was keenly interested in undermining his readers’ thoughtless attitudes towards members of cultures different from their own, and that his account of the force of custom along with his critique of ethnocentrism had an impact on important later thinkers (see below).

5. Moral and Political Philosophy

Morally and politically, Montaigne has often been interpreted as a forerunner of modern liberalism.  This is due to his presentation of himself as a lover a freedom who is tolerant of difference and who wishes to maintain a rather robust distinction between the private and public spheres.  The question of the extent to which he is trying to transform the political values of his contemporaries, as well as the question of the extent to which Montaigne takes his position to be founded upon metaphysical principles, are both subjects of debate.  Some read him as writing the Essays with primarily political intentions, and among those who subscribe to such a reading, there is disagreement as to the nature of his argument.  On the one hand, some scholars argue that Montaigne’s political prescriptions are grounded on a theory of human nature combined with skepticism concerning the possibility of obtaining knowledge of transcendent truth.  On the other hand, some interpret Montaigne in a more postmodern vein, arguing that he is not so much making an argument on the basis of truth claims as he is simply changing the subject, diverting the attention of his readers away from the realm of the transcendent and its categorical obligations to the temporal realm and its private pleasures.  Still others hold that politics does not occupy the central place in the Essays that some might think, and that the political content of the Essays is neither dogmatic nor rhetorical, but rather is part and parcel of his fundamental project of seeking self-knowledge for himself and inspiring that same desire in others.  On this interpretation, Montaigne’s political project is much more modest.  He is simply offering a new moral and political figure to be considered, inviting readers to reflect for themselves on their own beliefs and practices in an effort to act as a Socratic gadfly to the slumbering French body politic.  While it must be left to the reader to decide the extent to which a full-fledged political doctrine can be discovered in the Essays, as well as whether Montaigne is attempting to exert direct influence over his readers, it is nonetheless possible to identify a number of attitudes, values, and commitments that are central both to Montaigne’s moral and political thought and to modern liberalism.

First and foremost is Montaigne’s commitment to tolerance.  Always amazed at the diversity of the forms of life that exist in the world, Montaigne consistently remarks his tolerant attitude toward those whose ways of life or fundamental beliefs and values differ from his own; he is not threatened by such disagreements, and he does not view those who are different as in need of correction:

I do not share that common error of judging another by myself.  I easily believe that another man may have qualities different from mine. Because I feel myself tied down to one form, I do not oblige everybody else to espouse it, as all others do. I believe in and conceive a thousand contrary ways of life (façons de vie); and in contrast with the common run of men, I more easily admit difference than resemblance between us. I am as ready as you please to acquit another man from sharing my conditions and principles. I consider him simply in himself, without relation to others; I mold him to his own model. (F 169)

While radical skepticism does not in and of itself entail a tolerant attitude towards others, it seems that Montaigne’s more modest skepticism, if combined with a commitment to an objective moral order the nature of which he cannot demonstrate, might explain his unwillingness to condemn those who are different.

Montaigne’s commitment to toleration of difference produces a fairly robust distinction between the private and public spheres in his thought.  When discussing his tenure as mayor in “Of husbanding your will,” for example, he insists that there is a clear distinction to be made between Montaigne the mayor and Montaigne himself.  He performs his office dutifully, but he does not identify himself with his public persona or his role as citizen, and he believes that there are limits to what may be expected from him by the state.  Similarly, he makes a sharp distinction between true friendship and the sort of acquaintances produced by working relationships.  While he believes he owes everything to his friends and he expects the same in return, from those with whom he is bound by some professional relationship, he expects nothing but the competent performance of their offices.  Their religion or their sexual habits, for example, are no concern of his (see “Of friendship”).

In part, Montaigne’s tolerance and his commitment to the separation of the private and public spheres are the products of his attitude towards happiness.  Aristotelianism and Christianity, the two dominant intellectual forces of Montaigne’s time, emphasize the objective character of human happiness, the core content of which is fundamentally the same for all members of the human species.  These conceptions of happiness each rest on the notion of a universal human nature.  Montaigne, so impressed by the diversity that he finds among human beings, speaks of happiness in terms of a subjective state of mind, a type of satisfaction which differs from particular human being to particular human being (see “That the taste of good and evil depends in large part on the opinion we have of them,” “Apology for Raymond Sebond,” and “Of experience”).  Convinced of the possibility that the content of happiness differs so significantly from one person to the next, Montaigne wishes to preserve a private sphere in which individuals can attempt to realize that happiness without having to contend with the interference of society.

Another distinctively modern feature of Montaigne’s moral thought is the fact that when he treats moral issues, he almost always does so without appealing to theology.  This is not to say that he does not believe that God underwrites the principles of morality (an issue which cannot be decided on the basis of the text), but simply that Montaigne’s moral discourse is not underwritten by theology, but rather by empathetic concerns for the well being of the other and the preservation of the social bond.  Thus he identifies cruelty to other living beings as the extreme of all vices (see “Of cruelty”), while dishonesty comes second in Montaigne’s ordering of the vices, since as human beings we are held together chiefly by our word (see “Of giving the lie”).  Other vices he treats in terms of the degree to which they clash with society.  So, for instance, he finds that drunkenness is not altogether bad, as it is not always harmful to society and it provides pleasures that add greatly to our enjoyment of life (“Of drunkenness”).

Montaigne has been thought by some to have been a hedonist, and while others would disagree with this interpretation, there is no doubt that he thinks pleasure is an integral part of a happy human life, and a very real motivating force in human actions, whether virtuous or vicious.  Much of his ethical reflection centers around the question of how to live as a human being, rather than as a beast or an angel, and he argues that those who disdain pleasure and attempt to achieve moral perfection as individuals, or who expect political perfection from states, end up resembling beasts more than angels.  Thus throughout the Essays the acceptance of imperfection, both in individual human beings and in social and political entities, is thematic.

This acceptance of imperfection as a condition of human private and social life, when combined with his misgivings about those who earnestly seek perfection, leads Montaigne to what has appeared to some as a commitment to political conservatism.  Yet this conservatism is not grounded in theoretical principles that endorse monarchy or the status quo as good in and of itself.  Rather, his conservatism is the product of circumstance.  As he writes in “Of custom, and not easily changing an accepted law,” he has witnessed firsthand the disastrous effects of attempts at political innovation, and this has led him to be generally suspicious of attempts to improve upon political institutions in anything more than a piecemeal fashion.  Yet this rule is not without its exceptions.  In the next breath he expresses the view that there are times when innovation is called for, and it is the work of judgment to determine when those times arise.

6. Influence


Montaigne’s influence has been diverse and widespread.  In the seventeenth century, it was his skepticism that proved most influential among philosophers and theologians.  After Montaigne’s death, his friend Pierre Charron, himself a prominent Catholic theologian, produced two works, Les Trois Véritez (1594) and La Sagesse (1601), that drew heavily from the Essays.  The former was primarily a theological treatise that united Pyrrhonian skepticism and Christian negative theology in an attempt to undermine Protestant challenges to the authority of the Catholic Church.  The latter was more philosophically oriented, and is considered by many to be little more than a systematized version of “Apology for Raymond Sebond.”  Nonetheless, it was immensely popular, and consequently it served as a conduit for Montaigne’s thought to many readers in the first part of the seventeenth century.  There is also clear evidence of Montaigne’s influence on Descartes, particularly in the latter’s Discourse on Method.  There, in addition to skepticism, Descartes took up a number of Montaignian themes, such as the diversity of values and practices among human beings, the power of custom to govern our judgment, and the decision, after having recognized that the philosophers have been unable to bring any of their questions to a decision after centuries of investigation, to engage in self-study.  Ultimately, of course, Descartes parted ways with Montaigne quite decisively when he developed his dogmatic accounts of knowledge, the nature of the soul, and the existence of God. Pascal, on the other hand, also profoundly influenced by the Essays, concluded that reason cannot answer the theoretical question of the existence of God, and that therefore it was necessary to inquire into the practical rationality of religious belief.

In the eighteenth century, the attention of the French philosophes focused not so much on Montaigne’s skepticism as on his portrayal of indigenous peoples of the New World, such as the tribe he describes in “Of cannibals.”  Inspired by Montaigne’s recognition of the noble virtues of such people, Denis Diderot and Jean-Jacques Rousseau created the ideal of the “noble savage,” which figured significantly in their moral philosophies.  Meanwhile, in Scotland, David Hume’s Treatise of Human Nature showed traces of Montaigne’s influence, as did his Essays, Moral and Political.

A century later, Montaigne would become a favorite of Ralph Waldo Emerson and Friedrich Nietzsche.  In Emerson’s essay “Montaigne; or, the Skeptic,” he extols the virtues of Montaigne’s brand of skepticism and remarks Montaigne’s capacity to present himself in the fullness of his being on the written page: “The sincerity and marrow of the man reaches into his sentences.  I know not anywhere the book that seems less written.  Cut these words, and they would bleed; they are vascular and alive.”  Nietzsche, for his part, admired Montaigne’s clear-sighted honesty and his ability to both appreciate and communicate the joy of existence.  In Schopenhauer as Educator, he writes of Montaigne: “the fact that such a man has written truly adds to the joy of living on this earth.”

In the twentieth century Montaigne was identified as a forerunner of various contemporary movements, such as postmodernism and pragmatism.  Judith Shklar, in her book Ordinary Vices, identified Montaigne as the first modern liberal, by which she meant that Montaigne was the first to argue that cruelty is the worst thing that we do.  In Contingency, Irony, and Solidarity, Richard Rorty borrowed Shklar’s definition of a liberal to introduce the figure of the “liberal ironist.”  Rorty’s description of the liberal ironist as someone who is both a radical skeptic and a liberal in Shklar’s sense has led some to interpret Montaigne as having been a liberal ironist himself.

As many scholars have noted, the style of the Essays makes them amenable to a wide range of interpretations, which explains the fact that many thinkers with diverse worldviews have found the Essays to be a mirror in which they see their own reflection, albeit perhaps clarified to some degree by Montaigne’s penetrating insights into human nature.  This would not be inconsistent with Montaigne’s purposes.  In essaying himself publicly, he essays his readers as well, and in demonstrating a method of achieving self-knowledge, he undoubtedly intends to offer readers opportunities for self-discovery.

7. References and Further Reading

a. Selected editions of Montaigne’s Essays in French and English

  • Montaigne, Michel de.  Essais. 2nd Ed. Edited by Pierre Villey and V.-L. Saulnier. Paris: Presses Universitaires de France, 1992.
  • Montaigne, Michel de. Essais. Edited by André Tournon.  Paris: Imprimerie nationale, 1998.
  • Montaigne, Michel de. Essais. Edited by J. Balsamo, M. Magnien, and C. Magnien-Simonin. Paris: Gallimard, 2007.
  • Montaigne, Michel de. The Complete Essays of Montaigne. Translated by Donald M. Frame.  Stanford: Stanford University Press, 1943.
    • The translation used in the quotations above, parenthetically cited as “F.”
  • Montaigne, Michel de. The Complete Essays. Translated by M.A. Screech.  New York: Penguin, 1991.
  • Montaigne, Michel de. Michel de Montaigne: The Complete Works. Translated by Donald M. Frame. New York: Alfred A. Knopf, 2003.
    • Includes the “Travel Journal” from Montaigne’s trip to Rome as well as letters from his correspondence.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Brush, Craig B. Montaigne and Bayle:  Variations on the Theme of Skepticism.  The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff, 1966.
    • A thorough treatment of Montaigne’s skepticism; includes a lengthy commentary on “Apology for Raymond Sebond.”
  • Cave, Terence. How to Read Montaigne. London: Granta Books, 2007.
    • A helpful introduction to Montaigne’s thought.
  • Frame, Donald M. Montaigne: A Biography. New York: Harcourt, Brace and World, 1965.
    • A very thorough biography.
  • Friedrich, Hugo. Montaigne. Edited by Philippe Desan. Translated by Dawn Eng. Berkeley: University of California Press, 1991.
    • A landmark work in Montaigne studies; provides a thorough account of both the Essays themselves and the cultural context out of which they emerged.
  • Gauna, Max. Montaigne and the Ethics of Compassion. Lewiston: The Edwin Mellen Press, 2000.
    • A study of Montaigne’s ethics that situates him in the tradition of eudaimonism.
  • Hallie, Philip. The Scar of Montaigne: An Essay in Personal Philosophy. Middletown:  Wesleyan University Press, 1966.
    • An accessible account of Montaigne as a skeptic for whom the practice of philosophy is intimately tied to one’s way of life.
  • Hartle, Ann. Michel de Montaigne: Accidental Philosopher. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2003.
    • An excellent account of the philosophical nature of Montaigne’s thought.
  • La Charité, Raymond C. The Concept of Judgment in Montaigne. The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff, 1968.
    • A superb study of the role that judgment plays in Montaigne’s philosophical project.
  • Langer, Ullrich, ed. The Cambridge Companion to Montaigne. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2005.
    • Contains a number of helpful articles by preeminent Montaigne scholars.
  • Levine, Alan. Sensual Philosophy: Toleration, Skepticism, and Montaigne’s Politics of the Self. Lanham: Lexington Books, 2001.
    • Interprets Montaigne as a champion of modern liberal values such as tolerance the protection of a robust private sphere.
  • Nehamas, Alexander.  The Art of Living: Socratic Reflections from Plato to Foucault. Berkeley: University of California Press, 1998.
    • Includes a study of Montaigne’s relationship to Socrates, especially in connection with the essay “Of Physiognomy.”
  • Popkin, Richard. The History of Scepticism from Savonarola to Bayle. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2003.
    • Interprets Montaigne as a skeptical fideist in the Pyrrhonian tradition.
  • Quint, David. Montaigne and the Quality of Mercy: Ethical and Political Themes in the Essais. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1998.
    • Argues that Montaigne’s primary concern in the Essays is to replace the martial conception of virtue prevalent during his time with a new conception of virtue more conducive to the preservation of public peace.
  • Regosin, Richard. The Matter of My Book: Montaigne’s Essays as the Book of the Self. Berkeley: University of California Press, 1977.
    • A literary study examining the relation between Montaigne’s text and his conception of the self.
  • Sayce, Richard. The Essays of Montaigne: A Critical Exploration. London: Weidenfeld and Nicolson, 1972.
    • A classic comprehensive study of the Essays.
  • Schaefer, David Lewis. The Political Philosophy of Montaigne. Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1990.
    • Argues that the Essays are more systematic than they initially appear, and that Montaigne’s primary project in writing them was to transform the political and social orders of his time.
  • Shklar, Judith. Ordinary Vices. Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1984.
    • Interprets Montaigne’s ranking of cruelty as the worst vice as both a radical rejection of the religious and political conventions of his time and a foundational moment in the history of liberalism.
  • Starobinski, Jean. Montaigne in Motion. Translated by Arthur Goldhammer. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1985.
    • A postmodern reading the Essays that deals with major themes such as the body, friendship, the public and the private, and death.
  • Taylor, Charles. Sources of the Self: The Making of the Modern Identity. Cambridge, MA:  Harvard University Press, 1989.
    • Situates Montaigne in the history of modern conceptions of the self.

Author Information

Christopher Edelman
University of the Incarnate Word
U. S. A.

Lucian Blaga (1895—1961)

Lucian BlagaLucian Blaga was a prominent philosopher in Eastern Europe during the period between the two world wars. Trained in both Eastern Orthodox theology and classical philosophy, he developed a “speculative” philosophy that includes books on epistemology, metaphysics, aesthetics, philosophy of culture, philosophical anthropology, philosophy of history, philosophy of science, and philosophy of religion. A chair in philosophy of culture was created for him at the University of Cluj, a leading Romanian university of the period, now Babes-Bolyai University.

Unfortunately, the height of Blaga’s career coincided with WWII, after which Romania was occupied by Soviet troops that installed a socialist government. The new government removed Blaga and many other professors from their university posts. Although Blaga was forbidden to teach and publish, he continued to study and write. Eventually thirty-four of his books of philosophy were published. At the heart of his philosophical publications are four trilogies that constitute a systematic philosophy, a feat that has rarely been attempted since Hegel. He also published books of poetry and theater, plus one novel.

Today Blaga is a national figure in Romania, but because of the unfortunate circumstances surrounding his career, he is barely known to the outside world. However, because of his creativity and systematic vision, his work is being actively studied in Europe in the 21st century. There are those who argue that this mid-20th century philosopher can make valuable contributions to issues that philosophers are still struggling with today.

This article begins by explaining Blaga’s intellectual formation, which provides a context for understanding his philosophy. It then introduces the main features of his philosophical system and provides a bibliography of primary and secondary sources for further study.

Table of Contents

  1. Biographical Sketch
  2. Philosophy of Philosophy
  3. Epistemology
  4. Metaphysics
  5. Other Philosophical Issues
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
      1. English
      2. Romanian
      3. Other Languages
    2. Secondary Sources in English

1. Biographical Sketch


Lucian Blaga (1895-1961) was the son of a village priest. The village was Lancram, an ethnically Romanian village on the eastern edge of the Austro-Hungarian Empire. The priest was Isidor Blaga, an avid reader who seems to have enjoyed studying German philosophy as much as Orthodox theology. Isidor only reluctantly accepted the priestly vacancy in Lancram that was created by the premature death of his own father. A lack of finances to continue his education made this choice a necessity, but the priestly vocation was not Isidor’s original goal: he seems to have harbored more academic aspirations. His interest in higher learning, his interest in philosophy and his personal library would leave a profound imprint on his youngest son.

Life in the Romanian village too left a profound imprint on Blaga. A Romanian village of the late nineteenth and early twentieth century was essentially unaltered from medieval times. There was no industry and little mechanization to speak of. The economy was agricultural. The only schooling was a one-room primary school. Yet, a wealth of traditional wisdom preserved in legends, ballads, poems, and perhaps especially the multitude of proverbs and aphorisms that Lucian Blaga later collected and published in several volumes, provided its own kind of philosophical insight. The culture of the Romanian village would be the subject of Blaga’s acceptance speech given at his induction into the Romanian Academy in 1936.

Because of the dismal academics of the village elementary school and the complete lack of a high school, Isidor and his wife, Ana, sacrificed to send Lucian to private boarding schools. The urban centers in Transylvania were either Hungarian or German, and as a result the best educational opportunities were in Hungarian or German schools. The first school that Blaga attended was a German boarding school in the nearby town of Sebes. Here he studied in German and read important German thinkers. Blaga next enrolled in the prestigious Andrei Saguna High School in the city of Brasov where he studied German, Hungarian, Latin, and Greek. He was particularly interested in the natural sciences, the philosophy of science, and also world religions. A senior thesis was required for graduation from Andrei Saguna: Blaga’s was on Einstein’s relativity and Poincare’s non-Euclidean geometry.

Blaga intended to enroll in a German university upon graduation, but the onset of WWI prevented this. He took the only option open to him besides military service: he enrolled in the Romanian Orthodox seminary in Sibiu, another Transylvanian city. Although he neither enjoyed nor excelled at the more pastoral aspects of the seminary curriculum, he surpassed his classmates in the theoretical areas of study. During this period he especially increased his understanding of philosophy of religion and the history of art.

Blaga completed his undergraduate degree in 1917 and enrolled in the PhD program in philosophy at the University of Vienna. During this time he published his first two books, a book of poetry and a book of aphorisms, which sold well in Romania and helped him finance his studies. He successfully defended his dissertation in November of 1920. It was titled Kultur und Erkenntnis (Culture and Knowledge).

Blaga’s life experiences growing up in a multicultural region (Transylvania was populated by Romanians, Hungarians, Germans, Gypsies, and several smaller minority groups); experiencing the contrast between the peasant village and the modern city; and studying Eastern Orthodox theology and liturgy side by side with European philosophy, history, and science spawned in him a philosophical outlook that gives prominent place to philosophy of culture. Within the broad framework of culture Blaga finds places for science, art, history, and religion.

Blaga’s philosophical system interacts with the theories of classical and contemporary philosophers and intellectuals. These range from the pre-Socratics through early twentieth century philosophers like William James, Edmund Husserl, and Henri Bergson, and also intellectuals such as Albert Einstein, Sigmund Freud, and Paul Tillich. The influence of Plotinus, Kant, and the German Romantics is clearly evident. But Blaga’s philosophy is not merely an attempt to synthesize the insights of other thinkers. It is a systematic and integrated attempt to address the issues that occupied the leading minds of his day.

Blaga’s early philosophical career involved research and publication rather than teaching. He published many articles and a number of books, and served as an editor for several literary magazines. His publications range from fiction to philosophy. His first book of philosophy, Filosofia stilului (The Philosophy of Style), was published in 1924. He also served his country as a statesman. In 1936 he was inducted into the Romanian Academy (a prestigious research institution). Finally in 1938 a special chair of philosophy of culture was created in his honor at the University of Cluj, a leading Romanian university in Transylvania. His inaugural essay was titled Despre plenitudinea istorica (Concerning Historical Fullness). He taught at the University of Cluj until 1949, when he was removed from his post by the newly installed Socialist government of Romania. After this he was not permitted to teach and was only permitted to publish under strict supervision. After his death in 1961 a number of his works were permitted to be posthumously published, and since the fall of Romanian communism Blaga’s entire oeuvre has been republished.

2. Philosophy of Philosophy


Some philosophers philosophize about a range of topics without ever turning their analytic skills to an analysis of philosophy itself. In contrast to this, Blaga begins his systematic philosophy with an entire book dedicated to a critical discussion of philosophy. The title of this book is Despre constiinta filosofica (Concerning Philosophical Consciousness). It describes philosophy as a creative and constructive attempt to understand reality. Therefore Blaga views the construction of a systematic metaphysics as the pinnacle of the philosophical enterprise.

At the same time, Blaga rejects the notion that a philosophical system can ever provide an ultimate analysis of reality. All philosophical systems are creative interpretations that attempt to express reality symbolically through human language. But despite this apparent futility inherent in the philosophical task, Blaga views the attempt to “reveal” ultimate reality as the activity that brings humans closest to fulfillment.

The philosophical method is characterized by the utilization of logic and the attempt at objectivity, but subjectivity and style also have their place. Blaga elucidates the proper function of each. He argues that every philosophical system has a central thesis that orients the system. He names the orientation that this point provides the “transcendental accent.” This accent is an expression of the style of the philosopher who created it. For example, the knowledge of the Ideals, which serves as the transcendental accent in Plato’s philosophy, seems to reflect Plato’s own expansive personality and his drive to understand the many disparate aspects of his world.

It is not only the individual who is affected by controlling themes: such beliefs affect entire cultures. Sometimes these themes enter the public subconscious and are called “common sense.” Blaga recognizes that common sense beliefs often preserve wisdom based upon a wealth of experiences, but also warns that they sometimes preserve the prejudices and mistakes of previous generations. He then makes an important and controversial observation about the relationship of philosophy to common sense: whereas many Anglo-American philosophers have taken it upon themselves to defend common sense, Blaga argues that a philosopher must shun the conformist impulse underlying belief in common sense. A philosopher sometimes needs to attack common sense beliefs in order to open up a space for greater understanding.

This position vis-à-vis common sense could be taken as an indication that Blaga views philosophy as a realist rather than a constructivist attempt to understand reality. This would be at least partially mistaken, however. Blaga views philosophy as a creative activity that is justified even when its results are mistaken, since it deepens and enriches the understanding of the problematic of the human spirit. Thus philosophical speculation is justified quite apart from the truthfulness of its theories. Philosophy is justified by its fruitfulness, vision, suggestiveness, foresight, and how it stirs the soul, even if its theories never attain complete perfection.

This seems to suggest that philosophy is closer to art than to science, a view that would displease many analytic philosophers. Blaga finds both differences and similarities between philosophy and science. The primary difference between philosophy and science is methodological. Both begin with a set of objective data (the aria) and with certain presuppositions about how the data will be handled (the interior horizon of the problem). But while the data of science is very specific and the presuppositions are detailed and complex, the data of philosophy includes all of human experience and the presuppositions are very general. Because of this, a scientific investigation is very closely controlled by its initial data and its presuppositions; while philosophical investigation is open to many creative solutions that the scientist would not consider. Initially this might seem like a disadvantage, since it seems like an admission of the undisciplined nature of philosophical investigation in comparison to the fairly rigid discipline of the natural sciences. However, it also has a significant strength: Blaga points out that because of the very specific aria and interior horizon of a scientific investigation, science methodologically anticipates its solutions much more than philosophy does. Hence philosophy is more open to discovering the unexpected.

3. Epistemology

This discussion of the difference between philosophy and science draws on several ideas that Blaga elaborates in his epistemology. His primary works on this subject are the three books that comprise his “Trilogy of Knowledge”: Eonul dogmatic (The Dogmatic Age), Cunoasterea luciferica (Luciferic Cognition), and Cenzura transcendenta (Transcendent Censorship). These books analyze, with surprising lucidity, the entire range of modes of human cognition.

Blaga analyzes cognition into seven possible modes:

  1. Positive-adequate cognition
  2. Quasi-cognition
  3. Negative cognition
  4. Cognition that is part positive-adequate and part quasi-cognition
  5. Cognition that is part positive-adequate and part negative cognition
  6. Cognition that is part positive-adequate and part quasi-cognition and part negative cognition
  7. Cognition that is part quasi-cognition and part negative cognition

He discusses each of these modes of cognition, but only the second and the seventh are actually realized by humans. The second, quasi-cognition, can be further analyzed into concrete cognition, paradisaic cognition, mythic cognition, and occult cognition. The seventh, which Blaga names “luciferic cognition,” can be analyzed into three subdivisions: plus-cognition, zero-cognition, and minus-cognition. His discussion of the subdivisions of luciferic cognition, which is the subject of his book by that name, is perhaps the most original and most interesting part of his epistemology.

Blaga remarks that the possible forms of cognition can be analyzed into three types: (1) cognition that is positive-adequate and unlimited, (2) cognition that is censured but in principle unlimited, and (3) cognition that is positive-adequate but strictly limited. The first type would pertain only to a deity. The third type pertains to simple organisms and enables them to perform functions such as the replication of lost appendages. Human cognition falls within the second type, since human cognition is potentially unlimited in extent but strictly limited qualitatively, because it never completely captures its object and never perfectly corresponds to reality.

Mystery, and the cognitive limits that produce mystery, are central to Blaga’s epistemology (and perhaps to his whole philosophy). The reason for these limits is explained in his metaphysics, and the means are explained in his philosophy of culture.

There are at least five important features of Blaga’s epistemology that are innovative, to a greater or lesser degree, and that are significant epistemological contributions. The first of these is the placing of his epistemology within a complementary and explicatory metaphysical system, which will be discussed presently. This metaphysical speculation provides answers to such epistemologically relevant questions as: what are the material, efficient, and final causes of the human epistemological situation; why this situation pertains; how it was implemented; and how it is preserved. A second important feature is Blaga’s emphasis on the important role played in human cognition by culture. According to Blaga, even categories of understanding are culturally affected. He argues that there are both subjective and beautifully creative aspects of human cognition, and also that human cognition is not thwarted by its historicity but is rather empowered by it.

The third and fourth important contributions of Blaga’s epistemology are his analysis of the two types of cognition that he calls “luciferic cognition” and “minus-cognition.” Minus-cognition is a subset of luciferic cognition. Blaga devoted an entire book of his epistemological trilogy to minus-cognition, and another is largely devoted to luciferic cognition. In his elucidation of these two types of cognition, Blaga uncovers methods of problem solving that have heretofore been largely overlooked in Western epistemology.

A fifth important aspect of Blaga’s epistemology is its constructivism. Constructivism, the view that knowledge is a human construct, is a ubiquitous element of Blaga’s philosophy. It was seen in the previous elaboration of Blaga’s philosophy of philosophy, it is reflected in his epistemology, it will be seen in his freely creative metaphysics, and it can also be seen in his philosophy of culture and philosophy of religion.

There have been numerous other constructivist philosophers, ranging from Kant through Nietzsche to 20th century figures such as Jean Piaget and Ernst van Glasersfeld. Nonetheless, there are several important things about Blaga’s constructivism that make it particularly noteworthy. The first of these is how neatly and consistently constructivism fits within the larger philosophical picture that Blaga paints. His philosophical system gives constructivism a context, an explanation and a purpose that are sometimes lacking in other constructivist philosophies. A second noteworthy aspect of his constructivism is that it is argued for in a wide variety of cognitive contexts: Blaga shows that human thought is constructivist whether it occurs in math, the natural sciences, philosophy, theology, the arts, or in any other cognitive context. A third important aspect is how his constructivism is argued: he does not cease being a constructivist when he argues for his own philosophical system. He views his own system as merely a possible thesis supported (but not proved) by evidence and pragmatic utility.

More should be said about luciferic cognition, since this is one of the key insights of Blaga’s epistemology. Paradisaic cognition (what could be considered “ordinary cognition”) attempts to quantitatively reduce the mysteries of existence. Its progress is linear, adding new facts to the existent body of knowledge. Luciferic cognition, on the other hand, seeks to qualitatively reduce mystery through attenuation or, if that is not possible, through permanentization or intensification of the mysterious. Its progress is inward, deepening and intensifying knowledge of the hidden essence of the cognitive object. Every step of progress leads to another step, ad infinitum, and thus luciferic cognition is never totally successful in grasping its object, but it is successful in providing new understanding of the layers and aspects of the mystery of its being. Luciferic cognition does not exceed the inherent limits of human cognition, but it does explore those limits and press cognition to its fullest extent.

Luciferic cognition is dependent on paradisaic cognition for its starting point, the empirical, conceptual, or imaginary data that Blaga calls “phanic material.” It then “provokes a crisis” in the phanic material through bringing out the mysteries inherent in the object. Whereas paradisaic cognition views objects of cognition as “given,” luciferic cognition views them as partly given, but also partly hidden. Whereas paradisaic cognition is subject to the “illusion of adequacy”—the mistaken belief that the object is as it is perceived to be or, more precisely, the mistaken belief that paradisaic cognition is able to grasp the object as it really is—luciferic cognition begins with the removal of this illusion. An investigation that stops at the mere defining of an object as it is “given” overlooks potentially multitudinous other facets of knowledge about the object.

The distinction between the object of paradisaic cognition and the object of luciferic cognition bears a resemblance to Kant’s phenomena-noumena distinction, but has several important differences. One significant difference is that the Kantian noumenon is an object that is one single mystery; the luciferic object is a long series of latent mysteries. An even more important difference is that whereas the Kantian noumenon is not available to human cognition, Blaga’s luciferic objects are available to luciferic cognition (but are not cognized in the same way as objects are cognized in paradisaic cognition).

Blaga’s analysis of the process of luciferic cognition is fairly detailed and very interesting. It includes ideas that mirror more recent developments in the philosophy of science, such as his concepts of “theory idea,” “directed observation,” “categorical dislocation,” and “Copernican inversion of the object.” His concept of “theory capacity” resembles ideas suggested by American Pragmatists.

Blaga weighs in on the issues of truth and verification, which have largely dominated discussions in recent analytic epistemology. He accepts coherence as a necessary but not sufficient condition of truthfulness, and demonstration of correspondence as a sufficient but not necessary condition. He suggests that the best way to verify the truthfulness of a theory is pragmatic: put it into practice. His own philosophy is consistent with these views: it is a cohesive system, but he does not appeal to this cohesiveness as the grounds for believing it true. Rather he appeals to its ability to facilitate the resolution of philosophical problems.

4. Metaphysics

Blaga’s metaphysic is contained in the three books that form his “Cosmological Trilogy”: Diferentialele divine, (Divine Differentials), Aspecte anthropologice (Anthropological Aspects), and Fiinta istorica (The Historical Being). It is centered on a cosmology that is specifically intended to complement his epistemology. It is sometimes characterized as a “speculative” metaphysic rather than an empirical one. Blaga is firmly persuaded that metaphysical theories are not (and cannot be) proven empirically, although he accords a significant role to experience in the testing of such theories. His method resembles the hypothetico-deductive method wherein a theoretically possible solution to a problem is granted as a working hypothesis, and then the consequences of this hypothesis are deduced in order to determine if they are compatible with generally accepted theory. If they are, then the hypothesis stands as provisionally vindicated, despite the fact that the hypothesis itself has not been directly verified empirically.

Blaga states that metaphysical starting points are presupposed at the outset of the metaphysical investigation and are only subsequently justified by their ability to organize data and to “construct a world.” In elucidating his metaphysical vision, Blaga proposes a cluster of premises that are essential to the system he intends to promulgate. He then elaborates how these form the basis of a system that provides, or enables, the resolution of certain important problems heretofore not satisfactorily resolved by other metaphysical systems.

It is widely acknowledged that Blaga accepts and works within a sort of neo-Kantian Idealism, wherein the actual existence of an external world is accepted as a necessary metaphysical corollary even though an external world is not directly knowable epistemologically. If doing metaphysics would be defined along realist lines, as an accurate description of “noumenal” reality, then Blaga would not be able to do metaphysics, since according to his epistemology humanity cannot have perfect knowledge of objects of cognition. However, because Blaga views metaphysics as a creative and pragmatically justified endeavor that attempts to reach beyond the empirical and provide a theoretical explanation for all of existence, metaphysics is possible.

One of the first issues addressed in Blaga's metaphysical writings is the question of the origin of the cosmos. It is conceivable that the cosmos has no origin, and that it has always existed. Alternatively, it is possible that the cosmos has a specific origin. Blaga opts for the latter view because it “enormously facilitates approaching cosmological problems” and is therefore to be preferred. Based on this pragmatic justification, he proceeds to construct his metaphysics around a postulated beginning and source of the world.

That both the origin and the source of the cosmos are unknown is admitted by Blaga. Therefore one of the ways that he refers to the source is “The Anonymous Fund.” Theoretically, the cosmos could be a result of one or more creative acts of this Fund acting upon external preexistent sources; it could be an emanation from the Fund; or it could even be a reproduction of the Fund. Blaga rejects the possibility of creation using sources outside of the Fund, presumably because this would entail the existence of a cosmos that precedes the creation of the present cosmos, introducing a regress that thwarts the solving of the problems that Blaga is addressing. He also rejects the possibility of creation ex nihilo. Blaga opts for a theory of emanation similar to that proposed by Plotinus, an emanation wherein the Fund reproduces itself endlessly without diminishing itself in any way.

Blaga proposes that the Fund be viewed as possessing, due to its own “fullness,” the capacity of infinite self-replication. It controls its reproduction so that it will not destabilize existence. (Blaga grants that this sort of talk is necessarily metaphorical.) But it is the nature of the Fund to create/reproduce (this is inherent in the meaning of “fund”); therefore it allows itself to reproduce, but only in a specific mode that assures the longevity and greatest success of its reproductive acts. This controlled reproduction is the best compromise between the Fund's capacity for replication and the necessity of safeguarding the centrality of existence. Had such precautions not been taken, the result of the Fund's creative capacity would be a series of competing funds rather than the present world. What is remarkable, according to Blaga, is not so much that the present world exists, but that a series of competing funds does not exist. The present world is a result of the Fund’s own self-limitation, of the partial thwarting of the Fund’s natural creativity.

The form that the controlled reproduction of the Anonymous Fund takes is that of creation through “differentials”. Differentials are minute particles emanated from the Fund that exactly replicate minute aspects of the Fund and are emanated in endless numbers. The differentials have a natural propensity to combine with each other, forming new subcreations. The most central differentials are withheld from emanation in order to prevent the recombination of differentials into a copy of the Anonymous Fund. The recombination of emitted differentials has created the present world in its ever-changing forms.

This schema depicts the origin of the world as taking place in three phases: (1) the operation of limiting the generative possibilities of the Anonymous Fund, (2) the emission of differentials, and (3) the combination of differentials, creating more complex beings through integration. The schema also depicts the creation of the world as being based upon two fundamental factors, the Anonymous Fund's reproductive potential and its success in directing this potential into creating in a manner that preserves its own hegemony as metaphysical center of the universe.

Integration of the differentials is a natural result of the fact that the differentials are, in their structure, particles of one integrated whole. But integration does not occur on the basis of a perfect match between differentials. If it did, there would only be one line of integration that would result in only one type of created being. Integration takes place on the basis of a merely sufficient match between differentials. This allows for a vast number of different integrations, which explains such empirical phenomena as the existence of sometimes similar, sometimes identical or parallel features in entities that belong to different kingdoms, classes, phyla, and species.

Blaga offers the following empirical analysis in support of his theory that the world is composed of differentials. Upon close inspection, it can be observed that all empirical existents display at least three types of discontinuity: (1) Structural discontinuity: some existents are very simple structurally, others are very complex. (2) Intrinsic discontinuity: existents are at the same time independent and interdependent. (3) Discontinuity of repetition: groups of existents of the same type are composed of individuals. These phenomena are explained by the existence of discontinuity in the very heart of the empirical world. This fundamental discontinuity is a result of the empirical world being composed of a multitude of diverse differentials, variously integrated and organized. Furthermore, Blaga argues that two lines of empirical proof show that creation takes place through something akin to differentials: (1) The widespread consistency of certain structures and the equally widespread variability of others indicates that at the base of existence there is a discontinuity of elements that are capable of a variety of different combinations. (2) The presence of similar or identical features in entities that are otherwise very different from each other likewise indicates that existence is composed of a variety of elements capable of forming a variety of combinations.

Blaga discusses how the Anonymous Fund concept differs from and is similar to the theistic conception of God. Both are conceived as being the source of all else, the most central of all existents, and the greatest existent, to the extent that their own existence surpasses all others in both extent and in quality. However, Blaga states that he hesitates to use the term God to refer to his conception of the central metaphysical entity both because there are significant differences between his own conception and that of traditional theology, and because he believes it impossible to know whether the attributes usually ascribed to God apply to the Anonymous Fund. He grants that the term “God” could be used as a synonym for the Anonymous Fund, since according to his metaphysics there is nothing in existence that is more central than the Anonymous Fund. But Blaga will not even affirm that the Fund is a being in the usual sense, saying rather that conceiving it thus is merely a “crutch” used by the understanding.

Blaga sees the product of self-reproduction of the Anonymous Fund as necessarily differentiated from the Fund itself in order to preserve the order of the cosmos. This differentiation is accomplished by the Fund in order to achieve a specific goal. The goal and benefits of differentiated creation include: (1) facilitation of the fulfillment of the Fund’s generative nature, (2) the avoidance of genesis of innumerable identical “hypostases,” and (3) the avoidance of genesis of complex, indivisible, and indestructible existents that would have too great an autarchic potential, (4) the generation of complex existents that do not infringe upon numbers 2 and 3 above, (5) the genesis of an immense variety of existents and beings, (6) a proportioning of existents between those that are simple and those that are more complex, and (7) the generation of beings with cognitive capacity while at the same time censoring that capacity so as to protect both the beings and the order of the universe. Blaga believes that his proposal shows that the Anonymous Fund has employed a means of genesis that achieves a maximum number of advantages through the employment of a minimum number of measures.

He states that the existence of dis-analogy between Creator and creation is paradoxical. It is paradoxical because the expected result of an Anonymous Fund as postulated by Blaga would be the production of other entities like itself, the production of identical self-replications. Blaga finds it surprising but empirically evident that this self-replication does not take place. The explanation for this surprising nonoccurrence is the necessity of thwarting “theo-geneses” in order to preserve the necessary order of existence. Thus the apparent paradox is only an initial paradox, which is seen to be resolvable through the means of minus-cognition (as discussed in Blaga’s epistemology).

In Blaga’s metaphysics there are two important measures employed by the Anonymous Fund in preservation of cosmic equilibrium. One of these has already been discussed: differentiated creation. The other is transcendent censorship. While many metaphysicians have struggled with the question “What is the nature of existence?” and many epistemologists have struggled with “What are the methods of knowledge?” relatively few have sought to answer the question “What is it that impedes our answering of these fundamental questions?” Blaga insightfully observes that this “prohibitive factor” is one of the factors of existence that philosophy has yet to reckon with.

Blaga proposes that ultimate questions are difficult to answer, and in some sense unanswerable, because in addition to the ontological limit that the Anonymous Fund has imposed upon creation (through the means of differentiated creation), the Fund has also imposed a cognitive limit on creation. This was done at the time of the creation of the cosmos, and is now an inherent aspect, affecting all modes of cognition. Blaga refers to this limit as “transcendent censorship.” This censorship is accomplished via a network of factors, including obligatory epistemic reliance on the concrete, the intervention of cognitive structures, the resulting “dissimulation of the transcendent,” and “the illusion of adequacy.” Transcendent censorship not only prevents humans from having positive-adequate knowledge of the mysteries of existence, it prevents them from having “positive-adequate” knowledge of any object of cognition whatsoever. Blaga points out that this view has an interesting difference from the Kantian/neo-Kantian view. In Kant’s epistemology, existence is passive in the cognitive event; according to Blaga’s theory, existence is active in preventing itself from being known.

According to Blaga, the result of transcendent censorship is that all human knowledge is either dissimulation (in which objects of cognition are represented as being other than they really are), or negative cognition (in which antinomian elements of a cognitive problem are reconciled through the employment of a heuristic “theory idea,” which leads to a deepened understanding of the problem without resulting in its complete elimination), or a combination of these. This does not indicate that Blaga is a skeptic, however. Even the “mysteries” of existence are approachable through the strategy that Blaga names “luciferic cognition,” although they are not actually reachable.

The reasons that the Anonymous Fund would impose censorship upon its creation are similar to the reasons for its dissimulation of creation. Blaga lists the following four reasons for transcendent censorship: (1) Human possession of perfect knowledge would upset the equilibrium of existence by bestowing perfection on limited beings. (2) Human possession of perfect knowledge might threaten the benign governance of the universe by introducing the possibility of a human cognitive rival to the Anonymous Fund. (3) Possession of absolute knowledge would ossify the human spirit, quenching human creativity. (4) Censorship spurs human creativity and exertion, giving humanity its raison d’etre. To this list could be added the explanation that human creativity is one indirect outlet of the creativity of the Anonymous Fund, and anything that lessens human creativity is an attack on the creative intentions of the Fund.

The responsibility for the human inability to arrive at an absolute understanding of existence therefore rests squarely upon the Anonymous Fund, for benevolent reasons. This is in striking contrast to the philosophical system of Descartes, wherein God's righteousness and benevolence are made the foundation of all sure knowledge. In Blaga's system, the benevolence and wisdom of the Anonymous Fund result in the prevention of sure knowledge.

It is clear that Blaga’s metaphysical system can say relatively little about the actual structure of the universe, because according to this system such knowledge is structurally excluded from human cognition. Blaga’s system does allow for metaphysical postulation, however, and these postulates can be supported or substantiated by experience and by pragmatic arguments. Thus Blaga justifies himself in asserting that the cosmos has a center, and that this center is the Anonymous Fund.

Blaga does take stands on several of the standard issues of cosmology. He rejects both naive realism and subjective idealism (a la Berkeley), opting for a neo-Kantian critical realism. With regards to the monism-pluralism controversy, Blaga is clearly a pluralist. While the cosmos is a result of one single entity, and is composed of pieces emitted from that one entity, these pieces (the differentials) are separate, distinct entities in their own right. They are permanent and unchanging, and are the building blocks of all else that exists. Although Blaga is a realist, he is not a materialist. Differentials are not material, but rather are submaterial. They underlie all material existents, but underlie nonmaterial realities as well.

According to Blaga, humanity is, in a sense, the very pinnacle of the Anonymous Fund’s creation, because the human consciousness is the most complex organization of differentials it has permitted. There is also another sense in which humanity is the pinnacle of creation: more than any other complex created existent, humanity has the ability to further the Fund's own creative activity. Humans are naturally creative, and their creations can be viewed as secondary creations of the Anonymous Fund.

Human existence is characterized by two modes of existence, the “paradisaic” mode, which is the normal state of life in the world, and the “luciferic” mode, which is life lived in the presence of mystery and for the purpose of “revealing” it (grappling with it; trying to make it understandable). The latter mode results in an “ontological mutation” that is unique in the universe and essential to full humanness. “Mystery” is a result of the protective limits imposed on creation by the Anonymous Fund (transcendent censorship and the discontinuity between creator and creation). Through these means the Fund bestows upon humanity a destiny and a purpose in life: humanity’s purpose is to create; its destiny is to strive (through creating) to reveal the mysteries of existence.

Since the mysteries of existence are not ultimately fathomable by humans, humanity is doomed to a continual striving to reveal them, sometimes experiencing partial successes, but never reaching the ultimate goal. In Blaga's vision, human history becomes an endless, permanent creative state, never reaching its goal, but never exhausting its source of motivation and meaningfulness either. Through this artifice the Anonymous Fund gives to humanity a goal, a purpose, and gives it the unique historicity that makes it so culturally rich. Thus historicity is one of the greatest dimensions of human existence. It is seen to be a vital aspect of “luciferic” humanness. Likewise, the “principle of conservation of mystery,” which was made part of the very fiber of existence in order to preserve the centrality of the Anonymous Fund from the ambitions of created beings, is seen to be one of the chief metaphysical conditions of the historicity of humanity.

This description highlights the two opposing components that shape human history: the inner human desire to creatively reveal mystery, and the necessity of the Anonymous Fund to thwart this desire. This desire and its lack of fulfillment are here seen as essential both to the historicity of humanity and to full humanness, since they provide the peaks and valleys of failed attempts and renewed aspirations toward the absolute of which human history is composed.

The human inability to have absolute knowledge is often viewed as a failure, shortcoming, or handicap. Blaga reverses this evaluation, making human subjectivity and relativity essential to humanness and the glory of the human situation: according to Blaga, these factors give humanity its role and place in a great ontological scheme. Humans are not the deplorable victims of their own limits that they are sometimes supposed to be; rather, they are the servants of a system that is so great it surpasses them.

The final question of cosmology might be, “Is there anything beyond this cosmos?” Transcendent censorship does not prevent Blaga from having an answer to this question. All that exists is either one of two things: a structure of differentials emitted by the Anonymous Fund, or the Anonymous Fund itself. The cosmos is composed of differentials, as discussed above. The Fund, on the other hand, is not composed of differentials. Therefore the Anonymous Fund is not part of the cosmos. The answer to this question, then, is that there is something “beyond” the cosmos, but only one thing: the Anonymous Fund.

5. Other Philosophical Issues

From this sketch of Blaga’s epistemology and metaphysics one can infer the major themes and directions of the rest of his philosophy. His philosophy of culture elevates culture to the pinnacle of human existence. Culture is a product of the human drive to creatively “reveal” the mysteries of reality and the thwarting of this drive by the Anonymous Fund. Its creativity is an extension of the creativity of the Fund itself, and lends beauty and meaning to human existence. In his philosophy of history he describes humans as historical beings who derive their meaningfulness through living in the face of the unknown, wrestling with it, and conquering it, only to find that it rises up again, providing ever new mountains to climb. Human history is a record of a long series of only partially successful attempts to master our world. (It can be seen that history and culture are closely related, both as subjects and as themes in Blaga’s oeuvre.)

Blaga’s attitude towards science is fairly remarkable considering the positivistic philosophical currents of the early 20th century. He has a great appreciation for science as a cognitive approach that combines both paradisaic and luciferic cognition. As can be anticipated, his application of his epistemology to science leads to insights similar to those of Michael Polanyi and Thomas Kuhn. His is not a critique of science, per se, but rather an explanation of how science operates, locating it within the range of human creative endeavors that aim at revealing the mysteries of existence. As such, science, like art, religion, and all other human cognitive enterprises can be successful, but only within the boundaries postulated by Blaga’s metaphysics.

Blaga views religion as yet another attempt to penetrate the mysteries of existence. Religion is perhaps the grandest of all such attempts, since it aims the highest, but it is also the most doomed, since its reach far outstretches its grasp. He argues that religion is a cultural production, which is a position that caused great animosity toward him on the part of some contemporary Romanian theologians. However, an implication of his metaphysic is that religion is a response to the transcendent Anonymous Fund, a position that is fairly harmonious with Romanian Orthodox theology. And Blaga admits that his “Anonymous Fund” could also be termed “God,” though he explains that he avoids using this term because it carries with it so much baggage.

Blaga’s primary books on philosophy of culture are the three that comprise his “Trilogy of Culture”: Orizont si stil (Horizon and Style), Spatiul mioritic (The Ewe-Space), and Geneza metaforei si sensul culturii (The Genesis of Metaphor and the Meaning of Culture). His philosophy of history is exposited together with his philosophical anthropology in Aspecte antropologice (Anthropological Aspects) and Fiinta istorica (The Historical Being), two of the books making up his “Cosmological Trilogy.” He addresses issues in the philosophy of science in Experimentul si spiritual mathematic (Experiment and the Mathematical Spirit) and Stiinta si creatie (Science and Creation). His theory of aesthetics is outlined in Arta si valoare (Art and Value), and his philosophy of religion is explained in Gandire magica si religiei (Magical Thinking and Religion) and in a set of lecture notes that were posthumously published as Curs de filosofia religiei (Curse on the Philosophy of Religion). 

6. References and Further Reading

Blaga authored many books and articles. Unfortunately, while all of his poetry and some of his theater is available in English, his philosophy remains to be translated. An anthology of fragments, which have been translated into English, with some secondary sources in English as well, is available on CD from Richard T. Allen.

a. Primary Sources

i. English

  • Blaga, Lucian, and Andrei Codrescu (trans.). At the Court of Yearning. Columbus, OH: Ohio State University Press, 1989.
  • Blaga, Lucian, and Brenda Walker (trans.). Complete Poetical Works of Lucian Blaga. Iasi, RO, Oxford, GB, and Portland, USA: Center for Romanian Studies, 2001.
  • Blaga, Lucian, and Doris Planus-Runey (trans.). Zalmoxis: Obscure Pagan. Iasi, RO, Oxford, GB, and Portland, USA: Center for Romanian Studies, 2000.
  • Interestingly, some of Blaga’s poetry, accompanied by music and visuals, is also available on YouTube.

ii. Romanian

  • Eonul dogmatic (The Dogmatic Age). Bucharest: Cartea Romaneasca, 1931.
  • Cunoasterea luciferica (Luciferic Knowledge). Sibiu: Tiparul Institutului de arte grafice “Dacia Traiana,” 1933.
  • Cenzura transcendenta: Incercare metafizica. (Transcendent Censorship: A Metaphysical Attempt). Bucharest: Cartea Româneasca, 1934.
  • Orizont si stil (Horizon and Style). Bucharest: Fundatia pentru literatura si arta “Regele Carol II,” 1935.
  • Spatiul mioritic (The Ewe-Space). Bucharest: Cartea Româneasca, 1936.
  • Geneza metaforei si sensul culturii (The Genesis of Metaphor and the Meaning of Culture). Bucharest: Fundatia pentru literatura si arta “Regele Carol II,” 1937.
  • Arta Si valoare (Art and Value). Bucharest: Fundatia pentru literatura si arta “Regele Carol II,” 1939.
  • Diferentialele divine (The Divine Differentials). Bucharest: Fundatia pentru literatura si arta “Regele Carol II,” 1940.
  • Despre gandirea magica (Concerning Magical Thinking). Bucharest: Fundatia regala pentru literatura si arta, 1941.
  • Religie si spirit (Religion and Spirit). Sibiu: Editura “Dacia Traiana,” 1942.
  • Stiinta si creatie (Science and Creation). Sibiu: Editura “Dacia Traiana,” 1942.
  • Despre constiinta filosofica (Concerning Philosophical Consciousness). Cluj-Napoca: Lito-Schildkraut, 1947.
  • Aspecte antropologice (Anthropological Aspects). Cluj-Napoca: Uniunea nationala a studentilor din Romania, Centrul studentesc Cluj, 1948.
  • Experimentul si spiritul matematic (Experiment and the Mathematical Spirit). Bucharest: Editura Stiintifica, 1969.
  • Fiinta istorica (The Historical Being). Cluj-Napoca: Editura Dacia, 1977.

iii. Other Languages

  • Orizzonte e stile, ed. Antonio Banfi. Milano: Minuziano Editore, 1946.
  • Zum Wesen der rumanischen Volkseele, ed. Mircea Flonta. Bucharest: Editura Minerva, 1982.
  • L’Eon dogmatique, L’Age d’Homme, trans. Jessie Marin, Raoul Marin, Mariana Danesco, and Georges Danesco. Lausanne: Editions l'Age d'Home, 1988.
  • L’Eloge du village roumain, ed. Jessie Marin and Raoul Marin. Paris: Librairie du Savoir, 1989.
  • L’Etre historique, trans. Mariana Danesco. Paris: Librairie du Savoir, 1990.
  • Les Differentielles divines, trans. Thomas Bazin, Raoul Marin, and Georges Danesco. Paris: Librairie du Savoir, 1990.
  • La trilogie de la connaissance, trans. Raul Marin and Georges Piscoci-Danescu. Paris: Librairie du Savoir, 1992.
  • Trilogia della cultura: Lo spazio mioritico, trans. Ricardo Busetto and Marco Cugno. Alessandria, IT: Editionni dell’Orso, 1994.

b. Secondary Sources in English

  • Bejan, Cristina. "The Paradox of the Young Generation in Inter-war Romania,” Slovo, 18:2 (Autumn 2006): 115-128.
  • Botez, Angela. "Comparativist and Valuational Reflections on Blaga's Philosophy," Revue Roumaine de Philosophie et Logique 40 (1996): 153–62.
  • Botez, Angela. "Lucian Blaga and the Complementary Spiritual Paradigm of the 20th Century," Revue Roumaine de Philosophie et Logique 37 (1993): 51–55.
  • Botez, Angela. "The Postmodern Antirepresentationalism (Polanyi, Blaga, Rorty)," Revue Roumaine de Philosophie et Logique 41 (1997): 59–70.
  • Eliade, Mircea. “Rumanian Philosophy,” in Encyclopedia of Philosophy, ed. Paul Edwards (New York: Macmillan and the Free Press, 1967).
  • Flonta, Mircea. “Blaga, Lucian.” In Routledge Encyclopedia of Philosophy Online, edited by E. Craig. London: Routledge, 2004, (accessed January 3, 2006).
  • Hitchins, Keith. “Introduction to Complete Poetical Works of Lucian Blaga, translated by Brenda Walker, 23–48. Iasi, RO, Oxford, Portland, USA: Center for Romanian Studies, 2001.
  • Isac, Ionut. “Considerations on some Historical and Contemporary Issues in Lucian Blagas Metaphysics,” Journal for the Study of Religions and Ideologies 7:19, spring 2008, 184-202.
  • Jones, Michael S. “Culture and Interreligious Understanding according to the Romanian Philosopher Lucian Blaga,” Journal of Ecumenical Studies 45: 1, winter 2010, 97-112.
  • Jones, Michael S. “Culture as Religion and Religion as Culture in the Philosophy of Lucian Blaga,” Journal for the Study of Religions and Ideologies no. 15, winter 2006, 66-87.
  • Jones, Michael S. “The Metaphysics of Religion: Lucian Blaga and contemporary philosophy.” Teaneck and Madison, NJ: Fairleigh Dickenson University Press, 2006.
  • Munteanu, Bazil. “Lucian Blaga, Metaphysician of Mystery and Philosopher of Culture,” Revue Roumaine de Philosophie et Logique 39 (1995): 43–46.
  • Nemoianu, Virgil. “Mihai Sora and the Traditions of Romanian Philosophy,” Review of Metaphysics 43 (March 1990): 591–605.
  • Nemoianu, Virgil. “A Theory of the Secondary: Literature, Progress, and Reaction.” Baltimore: Johns Hopkins University Press, 1989, 153 –170.

Author Information

Michael S. Jones
Liberty University
U. S. A.

Manbendra Nath Roy (1887—1954)

M. N. RoyM. N. Roy was a twentieth century Indian philosopher. He began his career as a militant political activist and left India in 1915 in search of arms for organizing an insurrection against British rule in India. However, Roy's attempts to secure arms ended in a failure, and finally in June 1916, he landed in San Francisco, California. It was there that Roy, who was then known as Narendra Nath Bhattacharya, changed his name to Manbendra Nath Roy. Roy developed friendships with several American radicals, and frequented the New York Public Library. He began a systematic study of socialism, originally with the intention of combating it, but he soon discovered that he had himself become a socialist! Roy met Lenin in Moscow in 1920, and went on to become an international ranking communist leader. Nevertheless, in September 1929 he was expelled from the Communist International for various reasons. He returned to India in December 1930 and was sentenced to six years imprisonment for his role in the Kanpur Communist Conspiracy Case.

Roy’s real philosophical quest began during his prison years which he decided to use for writing a systematic study of 'the philosophical consequences of modern science', which would be a re-examination and re-formulation of Marxism to which he subscribed since 1919. The reflections, which Roy wrote in jail over a period of five years, grew into nine rigorous volumes. The 'Prison Manuscripts' have not yet been published in their totality, and are currently preserved in the Nehru Memorial Museum and Library Archives in New Delhi. However, selected portions from the manuscript were published as separate books in the 1930s and the 1940s.

In his philosophical works, Roy has made a clear distinction between philosophy and religion. According to Roy, no philosophical advancement is possible unless we get rid of orthodox religious ideas and theological dogmas. On the other hand, Roy has envisaged a very close relationship between philosophy and science. Moreover, Roy has given a central place to intellectual and philosophical revolution in his philosophy. Roy maintained that a philosophical revolution must precede a social revolution. Besides, Roy has, in the tradition of eighteenth century French materialist Holbach, revised and restated materialism in the light of twentieth century scientific developments. In the context of Indian philosophy, Roy could be placed in the tradition of ancient Indian materialism—both Lokayata and Carvaka.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
    1. Militant Nationalist Phase: In Search of Arms
    2. Towards Communism
    3. Return to India: Prison Years
    4. Beyond Communism: Towards New Humanism
    5. Final years
  2. Writings
    1. Autobiographical
    2. Philosophical
  3. Roy’s Concept of Philosophy
    1. Philosophy and Metaphysics
    2. Philosophy and Religion
    3. Philosophy and Science
  4. Roy’s New Humanism: Twenty-Two Theses on Radical Democracy
    1. Basic Tenets of New Humanism
    2. Humanist Interpretation of History
    3. Inadequacies of Communism
    4. Shortcomings of Formal Parliamentary Democracy
    5. Radical Democracy
  5. Philosophical Revolution or Renaissance
  6. Roy’s Materialism or Physical Realism
    1. Roy’s Materialism
    2. Roy’s Materialism and Traditional Materialism
      1. Change in the Concept of “Matter”
      2. Revision of Physical Determinism
      3. Objective Reality of Ideas and the Autonomy of the Mental World
      4. Emphasis on Ethics
    3. Roy’s Materialism and Marxian Materialism
      1. Delinking of Dialectics and Materialism
      2. Rejection of Historical Materialism
      3. Emphasis on Ethics
    4. Roy and Lokayata
  7. Roy’s Intellectual Legacy
  8. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Life


M. N. Roy’s original name was Narendra Nath Bhattacharya. He was born on 21 March 1887, at Arbalia, a village in 24 Parganas district in Bengal. His father, Dinabandhu Bhattacharya, was head pandit of a local school. His mother's name was Basanta Kumari.

a. Militant Nationalist Phase: In Search of Arms


Roy began his political career as a militant nationalist at the age of 14, when he was still a student. He joined an underground organization called Anushilan Samiti, and when it was banned, he helped in organizing Jugantar Group under the leadership of Jatin Mukherji. In 1915, after the beginning of the First World War, Roy left India for Java in search of arms for organizing an insurrection to overthrow the British rule in India. From then on, he moved from country to country, using fake passports and different names in his attempt to secure German arms. Finally, after wandering through Malay, Indonesia, Indo-China, Philippines, Japan, Korea and China, in June 1916, he landed at San Francisco in United States of America.

Roy's attempts to secure arms ended in a failure. The Police repression had shattered the underground organization that Roy had left behind. He had also come to know about the death of his leader, Jatin Mukherji, in an encounter with police.

b. Towards Communism


The news of Roy's arrival at San Francisco was somehow published in a local daily, forcing Roy to flee south to Palo Alto, California near Stanford University. It was here that Roy, until then known as Narendra Nath Bhattacharya or Naren, changed his name to Manbendra Nath Roy. This change of name on the campus of Stanford University enabled Roy to turn his back on a futile past and look forward to a new life of adventures and achievements.

Roy's host at Palo Alto introduced him to Evelyn Trent, a graduate student at Stanford University. Evelyn Trent, who later married Roy, became his political collaborator. She accompanied him to Mexico and Russia and was of great help to him in his political and literary work. The collaboration continued until they separated in 1929.

At New York, where he went from Palo Alto, Roy met Lala Lajpat Rai, the well-known nationalist leader of India. He developed friendships with several American radicals, and frequented the New York Public Library. Roy also went to public meetings with Lajpat Rai. Questions asked by the working class audience in these meetings made Roy wonder whether exploitation and poverty would cease in India with the attainment of independence. Roy began a systematic study of socialism, originally with the intention of combating it, but he soon discovered that he had himself become a socialist! In the beginning, nurtured as he was on Bankimchandra, Vivekanand and orthodox Hindu philosophy, Roy accepted socialism except its materialist philosophy.

Later in Mexico in 1919, Roy met Michael Borodin, an emissary of the Communist International. Roy and Borodin quickly became friends, and it was because of long discussions with Borodin that Roy accepted the materialist philosophy and became a full-fledged communist.

In 1920, Roy was invited to Moscow to attend the second conference of the Communist International. Roy had several meetings with Lenin before the Conference. He differed with Lenin on the role of the local bourgeoisie in nationalist movements. On Lenin's recommendation, the supplementary thesis on the subject prepared by Roy was adopted along with Lenin's thesis by the second conference of the Communist International. The following years witnessed Roy's rapid rise in the international communist hierarchy. By the end of 1926, Roy was elected as a member of all the four official policy making bodies of the Comintern - the presidium, the political secretariat, the executive committee and the world congress.

In 1927, Roy was sent to China as a representative of the Communist International. However, Roy's mission in China ended in a failure. On his return to Moscow from China, Roy found himself in official disfavor. In September 1929, he was expelled from the Communist International for "contributing to the Brandler press and supporting the Brandler organizations." Roy felt that he was expelled from the Comintern mainly because of his "claim to the right of independent thinking." (Ray 1987)

c. Return to India: Prison Years



Roy returned to India in December 1930. He was arrested in July 1931 and tried for his role in the Kanpur Communist Conspiracy Case. He was sentenced to six years imprisonment.

When Roy returned to India, he was still a full-fledged communist, though he had broken from the Comintern. The forced confinement in jail gave him more time than before for systematic study and reflection. His friends in Germany, especially his future wife, Ellen Gottschalk, kept providing him books, which he wanted to read. Roy had planned to use his prison years for writing a systematic study of 'the philosophical consequences of modern science', which would be in a way a re-examination and re-formulation of Marxism to which he had been committed since 1919. The reflections, which Roy wrote down in jail, grew over a period of five years into nine thick volumes (approximately over 3000 lined foolscap-size pages). The 'Prison Manuscripts' have not so far been published in their totality, and are currently preserved in the Nehru Memorial Museum and Library Archives in New Delhi. However, selected portions from the manuscript were published as separate books in the 1930s and the 1940s. These writings show that Roy was not satisfied with a primarily economic explanation of historical processes. He studied and tried to assess the role of cultural and ideational factors in traditional and contemporary India, in the rise and expansion of Islam, and in the phenomenon of fascism. He was particularly severe on the obscurantist professions and practices of neo-Hindu nationalism. Roy tried to reformulate materialism in the light of latest developments in the physical and biological sciences. He was convinced that without the growth and development of a materialist and rationalist outlook in India, neither a renaissance nor a democratic revolution would be possible. In a way, seeds of the philosophy of new humanism, which was later developed fully by Roy, were already evident in his jail writings.

d. Beyond Communism: Towards New Humanism



Immediately after his release from jail on 20 November 1936, Roy joined Indian National Congress along with his followers. He organized his followers into a body called League of Radical Congressmen. However, in December 1940, Roy and his followers left Congress owing to differences with the Congress leadership on the role of India in the Second World War. Thereafter, Roy formed the Radical Democratic Party of his own. This signaled the beginning of the last phase of Roy's life in which he developed his philosophy of new humanism.

After Roy's release from jail in 1936, Ellen Gottschalk joined Roy in Bombay in March 1937. They were married in the same month. Subsequently, Ellen Roy played an important role in Roy's life, and cooperated in all of his endeavors.

Roy prepared a draft of basic principles of “radical democracy” before the India conference of the Radical Democratic Party held in Bombay in December 1946. The draft, in which his basic ideas were put in the form of theses, was circulated among a small number of selected friends and associates of Roy. The "22 Theses" or "Principles of Radical Democracy", which emerged as a result of intense discussions between Roy and his circle of friends, were adopted at the Bombay Conference of the Radical Democratic Party. Roy's speeches at the conference in connection with the 22 Theses were published later under the title Beyond Communism.

In 1947, Roy published New Humanism - A Manifesto, which offered an elaboration of the 22 Theses. The ideas expressed in the manifesto were, according to Roy, "developed over a period of number of years by a group of critical Marxists and former Communists."

Further discussions on the 22 Theses and the manifesto led Roy to the conclusion that party-politics was inconsistent with his ideal of organized democracy. This resulted in the dissolution of the Radical Democratic Party in December 1948 and launching of a movement called the Radical Humanist Movement. At the Calcutta Conference, itself where the party was dissolved, theses 19 and 20 were amended to delete all references to party. The last three paragraphs of the manifesto were also modified accordingly. Thus, the revised versions of the 22 Theses and the manifesto constitute the essence of Roy's New Humanism.

e. Final years


In 1946, Roy established the Indian Renaissance Institute at Dehradun. Roy was the founder-director of the Institute. Its main aim was to develop and organize a movement to be called the Indian Renaissance Movement.

In 1948, Roy started working on his last major intellectual project. Roy's magnum opus Reason, Romanticism and Revolution is a monumental work (638 pages). The fully written, revised and typed press copy of the book was ready in April 1952. It attempted to combine a historical survey of western thought with an elaboration of his own system of ideas. While working on Reason, Romanticism and Revolution, Roy had established contacts with several humanist groups in Europe and America, which had views similar to his own. The idea gradually evolved of these groups coming together and constituting an international association with commonly shared aims and principles. The inaugural congress of the International Humanist and Ethical Union (IHEU) was planned to be organized in Amsterdam in 1952, and Roy was expected to play an influential role in the congress and in the development of the IHEU.

However, before going abroad, Roy needed some rest. He and Ellen Roy went up for a few days from Dehradun to the hill station of Mussoorie. On June 11 1952, Roy met a serious accident. He fell fifty feet down while walking along a hill track. He was moved to Dehradun for treatment. On the 25th of August, he had an attack of cerebral thrombosis resulting in a partial paralysis of the right side. The accident prevented the Roys from attending the inaugural congress of the IHEU, which was held in August 1952 at Amsterdam. The congress, however, elected M.N. Roy, in absentia, as one of its vice-presidents and made the Indian Radical Humanist Movement one of the founder members of the IHEU. On August 15 1953, Roy had the second attack of cerebral thrombosis, which paralyzed the left side of his body. Roy's last article dictated to Ellen Roy for the periodical Radical Humanist was about the nature and organization of the Radical Humanist Movement. This article was published in the Radical Humanist on 24 January 1954. On January 25 1954, ten minutes before midnight, M.N. Roy died of a heart attack. He was nearly 67 at that time.

2. Writings

a. Autobiographical


Roy was a prolific writer. He wrote many books edited, and contributed to several journals. However, he was reluctant to write about himself.  M. N. Roy’ Memoirs (627 pages), which he wrote after initial reluctance, only covers a short period of six years from 1915. When Roy was in an Indian prison, his friends in Germany, especially his future wife, Ellen Gottschalk, kept providing him books, which he wanted to read. Roy’s letters to her from jail, published subsequently as Letters from Jail (1943), contains pointers to his reading and thinking during those years.

b. Philosophical


Four volumes of Selected Works of M. N. Roy, edited by Sibnarayan Ray, have been published by the Oxford University Press.  Many of the writings of M. N. Roy such as Revolution and Counter-Revolution in China belong to the period when he was a communist. We have already mentioned some of his works related to the final humanist phase of his life, such as, Beyond Communism, New Humanism - A Manifesto and Reason, Romanticism and Revolution. According to M. N. Roy, his books Scientific Politics (1942) along with New Orientation (1946) and Beyond Communism (1947) constitute the history of the development of radical humanism. The final ideas are, of course, contained in New Humanism.

As mentioned earlier, Roy’s real philosophical quest began during his prison years after returning to India in 1930.  He decided to use his prison years for writing a systematic study of 'the philosophical consequences of modern science', which was to be in a way a re-examination and re-formulation of Marxism to which he subscribed since 1919. The reflections, which Roy wrote down in jail, grew over a period of five years into nine thick volumes (approximately over 3000 lined foolscap-size pages). The 'Prison Manuscripts' have not so far been published in their totality, and are currently preserved in the Nehru Memorial Museum and Library Archives in New Delhi. However, selected portions from the manuscript were published as separate books in the 1930s and the 1940s. Materialism (1940), Science and Superstition (1940), Heresies of the 20th Century (1939), Fascism (1938), The Historical Role of Islam (1939), Ideal Of Indian Womanhood (1941), Science and Philosophy (1947) and India's Message (1950) are among the books that were made from these handwritten note books. Of these Materialism and Science and Philosophy, are of special interest from the point of view of studying Roy’s concept of philosophy and his formulations on materialism.

Since 1937, Roy was editing a new weekly named Independent India. In 1949, Independent India weekly changed to The Radical Humanist weekly. The name of another quarterly journal The Marxian Way, which Roy had been publishing since 1945 in collaboration with Sudhindranath Datta, was changed to The Humanist Way in the same year. The Humanist Way has ceased publication, but The Radical Humanist is still being published by the Indian Renaissance Institute as a monthly.

3. Roy’s Concept of Philosophy

Philosophy, according to Roy, is contemplation, study and knowledge of nature. Its function is "to know things as they are, and to find the common origin of the diverse phenomena of nature, in nature itself".

Philosophy, says Roy, begins when “spiritual needs” of human beings are no longer satisfied by primitive natural religion, which imagines and worships a variety of gods as personification of the diverse phenomena of nature. The grown-up human is no longer satisfied with the nursery-tales, with which “he was impressed in his spiritual childhood”. Intellectual growth emboldens him to seek the causes of all natural phenomena in nature itself and to “find in nature a unity behind its diversity." (Roy 1951)

In his book Science and Philosophy, Roy defines philosophy as "the theory of life". The function of philosophy, in words of Roy, "is to solve the riddle of the Universe". According to Roy, philosophy is born out of the efforts of man to explain nature and to understand his own relationship with it. (5-6)

a. Philosophy and Metaphysics

Roy has made a distinction between philosophy and metaphysics. According to him, metaphysics also begins with the desire to discover the unity behind the diversity. However, it leaves the ground of philosophy in its quest for a “noumenon” beyond nature, something that is distinct from “phenomena”. Thus, it abandons the inquiry into what really exists, and “plunges into the wilderness of speculation”. It takes up the absurd task of knowing the intangible, as the condition for the knowing the tangible.

It is obvious that Roy was opposed to speculative philosophy, which set for itself the impossible task of prying into the transcendental being "above and behind" the physical universe - of acquiring the knowledge of the reality behind the appearance. According to Roy, an inquiry, which denies the very existence of the object to be enquired, is bound to end in idle dreams and hopeless confusion.

b. Philosophy and Religion

Roy was opposed not only to speculative philosophy but also to the identification of philosophy with poetic fancy or theology and religion. According to him, for the average educated human, the term philosophy has a very vague meaning. It stands not only for speculative thought, but also for poetic fancy. Not only that, in India, philosophy is often not distinguished from religion and theology. “Indeed,” according to Roy, “what is generally believed to be the distinctive feature of Indian philosophy is that it has not broken away from the medieval tradition, as modern Western philosophy did in the seventeenth century.”

According to Roy, faith in the supernatural does not allow the search for the causes of natural phenomena in nature itself. Therefore, rejection of orthodox religious ideas and theological dogmas is the precondition for philosophy.  Roy was of the view that, religion will certainly be liquidated by the rise of science, because scientific knowledge enables humankind to answer questions, confronted by which in its childhood, it was forced to assume super-natural forces or agencies. Therefore, according to Roy, in order to perform its function, "philosophy must break away from religion" and start from the reality of the physical universe.

c. Philosophy and Science

On the one hand, Roy regards rejection of orthodox religious ideas and theological dogmas as the essential precondition of philosophy, and on the other, he envisages a very intimate relationship between philosophy and science. In fact, according to Roy, the philosophical significance of modern scientific theory is to render untenable the old division of labor between science and philosophy. Science is, says Roy, stepping over the old boundary line, “Digging deeper and deeper into the secrets of nature, science has come up against problems, the solution of which was previously left to philosophy. Scientific inquiry has pushed into what is traditionally regarded as the 'metaphysical' realm."

The problems of philosophy - cosmology, ontology and epistemology - can all be progressively solved, according to Roy, in the light of scientific knowledge. The function of philosophy is, points out Roy, to explain existence as a whole. An explanation of existence requires knowledge of existence. Knowledge about the different phases of existence is being gathered by the various branches of science. Therefore, says Roy, the function of philosophy is to coordinate an entire body of scientific knowledge into a comprehensive theory of nature and life.  Philosophy can now exist only as the science of sciences - a systematic coordination, a synthesis of all positive knowledge, continuously readjusting itself to progressive enlargement of the store of human knowledge. A mystic metaphysical conception of the world is no longer to be accorded the distinction of philosophy. Thus, according to Roy, philosophy is a logical coordination of all the branches of positive knowledge in a system of thought to explain the world rationally and to serve as a reliable guide for life.

4. Roy’s New Humanism: Twenty-Two Theses on Radical Democracy


"New Humanism" is the name given by Roy to the "new philosophy of revolution" which he developed in the later part of his life. This philosophy has been summarized by Roy in the "Twenty-Two Theses" and elaborated in his New Humanism - A Manifesto.

New Humanism, as presented in the Twenty-Two Theses, has both a critical and a constructive aspect. The critical aspect consists of describing the inadequacies of communism (including the economic interpretation of history), and of formal parliamentary democracy. The constructive aspect, on the other hand, consists of giving highest value to the freedom of individual, presenting a humanist interpretation of history, and outlining a picture of radical or organized democracy along with the way for achieving the ideal of radical democracy.

a. Basic Tenets of New Humanism


Apart from Roy's effort to trace the quest for freedom and search for truth to the biological struggle for existence. The basic idea of the first three theses of Roy is individualism. According to Roy, the central idea of the Twenty-Two Theses is that political philosophy must start from the basic idea that the individual is prior to society, and freedom can be enjoyed only by individuals.

Quest for freedom and search for truth, according to Roy, constitute the basic urge of human progress. The purpose of all-rational human endeavor, individual as well as collective, is attainment of freedom in ever-increasing measure. The amount of freedom available to the individuals is the measure of social progress. Roy refers back the quest for freedom to human being's struggle for existence, and he regards search for truth as a corollary to this quest. Reason, according to Roy, is a biological property, and it is not opposed to human will. Morality, which originates from the rational desire for harmonious and mutually beneficial social relations, is rooted in the innate rationality of man.

b. Humanist Interpretation of History


In his humanist interpretation of history, presented in theses four, five and six, Roy gives an important place to human will as a determining factor in history, and emphasizes the role of ideas in the process of social evolution. Formation of ideas is, according to Roy, a physiological process but once formed, ideas exist by themselves and are governed by their own laws. The dynamics of ideas runs parallel to the process of social evolution and both of them influence each other. Cultural patterns and ethical values are not mere super structures of established economic relations. They have a history and logic of their own.

c. Inadequacies of Communism

Roy's criticism of communism, contained in theses seven to eleven is based mainly on the experience of the former Soviet Union, particularly the "discrepancy between the ideal and the reality of the socialist order."  According to Roy, freedom does not necessarily follow from the capture of political power in the name of the oppressed and the exploited classes and abolition of private property in the means of production. For creating a new world of freedom, revolution must go beyond an economic reorganization of society. A political system and an economic experiment which subordinate the man of flesh and blood to an imaginary collective ego, be it the nation or class, cannot possibly be, in Roy's view, the suitable means for the attainment of the goal of freedom.

The Marxian doctrine of state, according to which the state is an instrument of exploitation of one class by another, is clearly rejected by Roy. According to Roy, the state is "the political organization of society" and "its withering away under communism is a utopia which has been exploded by experience".

Similarly, Roy rejects the communist doctrine of the dictatorship of the proletariat. "Dictatorship of any form, however plausible may be the pretext for it, is," asserts Roy, "excluded by the Radical-Humanist perspective of social revolution".

d. Shortcomings of Formal Parliamentary Democracy


Roy has discussed the shortcomings of formal parliamentary democracy in his twelfth and thirteenth theses. These flaws, according to Roy, are outcome of the delegation of power. Atomized individual citizens are, in Roy's view, powerless for all practical purposes, and for most of the time. They have no means to exercise their sovereignty and to wield a standing control of the state machinery.

"To make democracy effective," says Roy, "power must always remain vested in the people and there must be ways and means for the people to wield sovereign power effectively, not periodically, but from day to day."

e. Radical Democracy


Thus, Roy's ideal of radical democracy, as outlined in theses fourteen to twenty-two consists of a highly decentralized democracy based on a network of people's committee's through which citizens wield a standing democratic control over the state.

Roy has not ignored the economic aspect of his ideal of radical democracy. He argued that progressive satisfaction of the material necessities is the pre-condition for the individual members of society unfolding their intellectual and other finer human potentialities. According to him, an economic reorganization, which will guarantee a progressively rising standard of living, is the foundation of the Radical Democratic State. “Economic liberation of the masses”, says Roy, “is an essential condition for their advancing towards the goal of freedom."

The ideal of radical democracy will be attained, according to Roy, through the collective efforts of mentally free men united and determined for creating a world of freedom. They will function as the guides, friends and philosophers of the people rather than as their would-be rulers. Consistent with the goal of freedom, their political practice will be rational and, therefore, ethical.

Roy categorically asserts that a social renaissance can come only through determined and widespread endeavor to educate the people as regards the principles of freedom and rational co-operative living.  Social revolution, according to Roy, requires a rapidly increasing number of men of the new renaissance, and a rapidly expanding system of people's committees and an organic combination of both. The program of revolution will similarly be based on the principles of freedom, reason and social harmony.

As pointed out by Roy himself in his preface to the second edition of the New Humanism: A Manifesto, though new humanism has been presented in the twenty-two theses and the Manifesto as a political philosophy, it is meant to be a complete system. Because of being based on the ever-expanding totality of scientific knowledge, new humanism cannot be a closed system. "It will not be", says Roy, "a dogmatic system claiming finality and infallibility."

f. Philosophical Revolution or Renaissance

It is obvious from the foregoing that Roy was a great supporter of philosophical revolution or renaissance, and he has given a central place to it in his radical humanism. Roy was an admirer of European renaissance and drew inspiration from it. For him, "the renaissance was the revolt of man against God and his agents on this earth". According to Roy, the renaissance "heralded the modern civilization and the philosophy of freedom". He strongly believed that India, too, needed a renaissance on rationalist and humanist lines. According to him, this was a necessary condition for democracy to function in a proper manner. He believed that “a new Renaissance based on rationalism and cosmopolitan humanism” was essential for democracy to be realized. (Roy has used the word “rationalist” not in the Cartesian sense but in the popular sense. In this sense, a “rationalist” regards reason including both perception and inference as a source of knowledge.)

According to Roy, a philosophical revolution must precede a social revolution. He was opposed to blind faith and superstitions of all kinds and supported rationalism. As a physical realist, he rejected all allegedly supernatural entities like god and soul. Similarly, he was opposed to fatalism and the doctrine of karma. He unequivocally rejected the religious mode of thinking and advocated a scientific outlook and a secular morality. As noted earlier, he was in favor of delinking philosophy with religion and associating it closely with science.  He believed that science would ultimately liquidate religion.

According to Roy, a revolutionary is one who has got the idea that the world can be remade, made better than it is to-day, that it was not created by a supernatural power, and therefore, could be remade by human efforts.

Further, according to Roy, "the idea of improving upon the creation of God can never occur to God-fearing. We can conceive of the idea only when we know that all gods are our own creation, and we can depose whomsoever we have enthroned."

Roy's critical approach towards religion comes out very clearly in the preface of his book, India's Message, where he asserts that a criticism of religious thought and a searching analysis of traditional beliefs and the time-honored dogmas of religion is essential for the belated Renaissance of India. “The spirit of inquiry should overwhelm the respect for tradition."

According to Roy, "a critical examination of what is cherished as India's cultural heritage will enable the Indian people to cast off the chilly grip of a dead past. It will embolden them to face the ugly realities of a living present and look forward to a better, brighter and pleasanter future." Thus, Roy was opposed to an uncritical and vain glorification of India's so-called "spiritual" heritage. However, he did not stand for a wholesale rejection of ancient Indian thought either. He favored a rational and critical approach towards ancient traditions and thoughts. Roy believed that the object of European renaissance was to rescue the positive contributions of ancient European civilization, which were lying buried in the Middle Ages owing to the dominance of the Church. Roy had something similar in his mind about India. According to him, one of the tasks of the Renaissance movement should be to rescue the positive outcome and abiding contributions of ancient thought - contributions, which just like the contributions of Greek sages, are lying in ruins under the decayed structure of the Brahmanical Society - the tradition of which is erroneously celebrated as the Indian civilization.

5. Roy’s Materialism or Physical Realism

a. Roy’s Materialism

M .N. Roy was a strong supporter of materialist philosophy. According to Roy, strictly speaking, materialism is “the only philosophy possible”, because  it represents the knowledge of nature as it really exists—knowledge acquired through the contemplation, observation and investigation of nature itself.

Roy points out that materialism is not the “monstrosity” it is generally supposed to be. It is not the cult of "eat, drink and be merry", as it has been depicted by its ignorant or malicious adversaries. It simply maintains that "the origin of everything that really exists is matter, that there does not exist anything but matter, all other appearances being transformations of matter, and these transformations are governed necessarily by laws inherent in nature."  (Roy 1951)

Thus, broadly speaking, Roy's philosophy is in the tradition of materialism. However, there are some important differences between Roy's materialism and traditional materialism.  In fact, Roy's "materialism" is a restatement of traditional materialism in the light of contemporary scientific knowledge.  According to Roy, the substratum of the universe is not matter as traditionally conceived, but it is “physical as against mental or spiritual”. It is, in other words, “a measurable entity”. Therefore, says Roy, to prevent prejudice, materialism could be renamed “physical realism”.

b. Roy’s Materialism and Traditional Materialism

Roy was of the view that materialism must be dissociated from certain notions, which have been rendered untenable by the discoveries of science. His revision and restatement of materialism embraces both the basic tenets of materialism: the concept of matter as well as the doctrine of physical determinism.

i. Change in the Concept of “Matter”

According to Roy, the discoveries of quantum physics have "made the classical notion of matter untenable". Nevertheless, Roy insists that though the substratum of the universe is "not matter as traditionally conceived" it is "physical as against mental or spiritual. It is a measurable entity".

The so-called "crisis" of materialism, according to Roy, involved the conception of matter, and not its existence.  The "crisis" simply exposed the inadequacy of the old atomist theory. The substance of the "crisis" was, "that it appeared to reduce matter from mass to energy and radiation". However, there cannot be any doubt about the fact that "atomic physics deals with material realities which exist objectively, outside the mind of the physicist." Thus, in Roy's physical realism "matter" is not made up of hard and massy stone-like atoms as in traditional "mechanical materialism". The whole concept of "matter" has been revised in the light of new physics. In fact, Roy was even ready to discard the term "matter" provided a more appropriate new term could be coined. In Science and Philosophy, Roy describes "matter" as the "sole-existence." According to Roy, it is not very important what name is attached to the "substratum of existence" - matter, energy, action, vibratory motion or field. However, he insists that it is a physical reality. What Roy means by calling it physical is that it exists objectively and that it is measurable. As we have seen, Roy has even renamed his revised version of materialism as "physical realism".

ii. Revision of Physical Determinism


Roy disagrees with the view of some thinkers that Heisenberg's Principle of Uncertainty requires the rejection of the doctrine of determinism. According to Roy, only a modification in the traditional conception of causality is required. Causality, in Roy's view, is not an a priori form of thought or an axiomatic law; it is physical relation inherent in the constitution of the universe.

Roy, in fact, tries to temper a rigidly mechanical view of determinism by interpreting it in terms of probability. He admits plurality of possibilities and the element of contingency in the world, and tries to show that determinism and probability are not mutually exclusive. However, Roy insists that statistical methods presuppose determinism. The universe is a law-governed system, and the existence of law presupposes causality. He is emphatic that the element of uncertainty in the sub-atomic world is not to be equated with indeterminacy. Rejection of the idea that there are invariant relations in nature, maintains Roy, will blast the very foundation of science.

Roy also tries to reconcile “freedom of will” with determinism. According to him, human beings possess free will and can choose out of various alternatives in front of them. Roy, however, is not unique among materialists in recognizing free will. Epicurus, among ancient Greek materialists, and Hobbes, among modern materialists, tried to accommodate free will in their philosophies. According to Roy, the vast world of biological evolution lies between the world of human beings and the world of inanimate matter, and, therefore, the world of human beings has its own specific laws, though these laws can be referred back to the general laws of the world of dead matter. Nevertheless, human will, says Roy, cannot be directly related to the laws of physical universe. Thus, Roy is not, to use the terminology of William James, a "hard" determinist like Holbach, but a "soft" determinist like Hobbes.

iii. Objective Reality of Ideas and the Autonomy of the Mental World

Though Roy traces the origin of mental activities to the physical background of the living world, yet he also grants them an objective existence of their own. Mind and matter, according to Roy, can be reduced to a common denominator; as such, they are two objective realities. In Roy's view, once formed, ideas exist by themselves, governed by their own laws. Thus, Roy grants much more objectivity and autonomy to the mental world than has been traditionally granted by materialists. Roy's materialism is not an "extreme" materialism like that of the eighteenth century French materialist, Julien de la Mettrie, who regarded man to be a self-moving machine. According to Roy, on the other hand, "Man is not a living machine, but a thinking animal".

iv. Emphasis on Ethics

Roy has given a very important place to ethics in his philosophy. According to Roy, "the greatest defect of classical materialism was that its cosmology did not seem to have any connection with ethics". Roy strongly asserts that if it is not shown that materialist philosophy can accommodate ethics, then, human spirit, thirsting for freedom, will spurn materialism. In Roy' view materialist ethics is not only possible but also the noblest form of morality. Roy links morality with human being's innate rationality. Human beings are moral, according to Roy, because they are rational. In Roy's ethics freedom, which he links with the struggle of existence is the highest value. Search for truth is a corollary to the quest for freedom.

However, Roy is not unique among materialists in emphasizing the importance of ethics in his philosophy. Contrary to popular impression, ancient materialist Epicurus and modern materialist Holbach, for example, accorded an important place to ethics in their philosophies. However, the details of Roy's ethics are somewhat different from these philosophers.

c. Roy’s Materialism and Marxian Materialism


Before he formulated and expounded his own philosophy of New Humanism, Roy was an orthodox Marxist. In fact, Roy's revision of materialism was carried out in the context of Marxism. Thus, Roy's revision of materialism in general is also applicable to Marxian materialism to the extent Marxian materialism resembles traditional materialism.

Roy's Physical Realism is, however, different from Marxian materialism in three important ways:

i. Delinking of Dialectics and Materialism

Roy considers the Hegelian heritage a weak spot of Marxism. The simplicity and scientific soundness of materialism are marred by making its validity conditional upon dialectic. According to Roy, materialism pure, and simple, can stand on its own legs, and, therefore, he tries to de-link dialectics from materialism. The validity of materialism, maintains Roy, is in no way conditional on dialectics, as there is no logical connection between the two.

ii. Rejection of Historical Materialism

Roy rejects historical materialism and advocates a humanist interpretation of history in which he gives an important place to human will as a determining factor in history, and he recognizes the autonomy of the mental world. He argues that human will cannot be directly related to the laws of physical universe. Ideas, too, have an objective existence, and are governed by their own laws. The economic interpretation of history is deduced from a wrong interpretation of materialism.

iii. Emphasis on Ethics


Roy's materialism is sharply different from Marxian materialism in so far it recognizes the importance of ethics and gives a prominent place to it. According to Roy, Marxian materialism wrongly disowns the humanist tradition and thereby divorces materialism from ethics. The contention that "from the scientific point of view this appeal to morality and justice does not help us an inch farther" was based, according to Roy, upon a false notion of science.

d. Roy and Lokayata


His materialism or physical realism could be placed in the tradition of ancient Indian materialism: Lokayata or Carvaka. In fact, in the third chapter of his book Materialism, titled “Materialism in Indian Philosophy”, Roy has approvingly referred to Lokayata. According to him, “the long process of the development of naturalist, rationalist, skeptic, agnostic and materialist thought in ancient India found culmination in the Charvak system of philosophy, which can be compared with Greek Epicureanism, and as such is to be appreciated as the positive outcome of the intellectual culture of India”. (94)

6. Roy’s Intellectual Legacy

Roy was a former Marxist and a hero of Indian communists for having rubbed shoulders with Lenin and Stalin. However, he later gave up Marxism and advocated his own “radical humanism”. Naturally, he has been criticized generally by Marxists and communists for renouncing Marxism as well as for finding fault with communist doctrines like “the dictatorship of the proletariat”. Nonetheless, there was a small group of intellectuals who collaborated closely with him in preparing the “Twenty-two Theses on Radical Democracy” and New Humanism: A Manifesto; namely, V. M. Tarkunde, Phillip Spratt, Laxman Shastri Joshi, Sibnarayan Ray, G. D. Parikh, G. R. Dalvi, Sikander Choudhary and Ellen Roy (Roy’s wife). Some of them like Tarkunde, Sibnarayan Ray and G. D. Parikh remained active in the radical humanist movement launched by Roy and also wrote and edited books on him. (See References and Further Reading)

Among the journals founded by M. N. Roy, The Humanist Way, has ceased publication, but The Radical Humanist is still being published as a monthly by the Indian Renaissance Institute. It was edited for a long time by Tarkunde. Since Tarkunde, it has been edited by R. M. Pal and R. A. Jahagirdar among others.

Outside the select group of Roy’s close friends and associates, A. B. Shah, founder of the Indian Secular Society and The Secularist journal was one of the important intellectuals influenced by Roy’s ideas.

Some of his final ideas are open to criticism even from a humanist perspective. For example, Roy’s use of the word “spiritual” in certain contexts is problematic. Roy talks of “spiritual needs” and “spiritual childhood” of human beings (Section 3), when, in fact, he was a materialist. He was at pains to emphasize that reality is “physical as against mental or spiritual” (Section 5 a ). As a materialist, he was also opposed to the vain glorification of the so-called “spiritual” heritage of India. (Section 4 f ) Apparently, Roy has used the word “spiritual” in phrases like “spiritual needs” and “spiritual childhood” in the sense of “intellectual.” Nonetheless, the use of the term “spiritual” by Roy even in these contexts could be misleading, considering the fact that he did not believe in the existence of soul and spirit. (Ramendra 2001)

Roy’s advocacy of party-less democracy, too, is open to criticism. Freedom of association is a fundamental democratic freedom. In any democracy worth the name, citizens with similar political ideas and programs are bound to come together and cooperate with one another by forming political parties and other non-party organizations. The only possible way to prevent them from doing so will be to deny the fundamental right to association, which will be an undemocratic act in itself. Therefore, the ideal of “party-less democracy” seems to be self-contradictory, impractical and unrealizable.

7. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Parikh, G. D. compiler.  Essence of Royism (Bombay: Nav Jagriti Samaj, 1987).
    • Anthology of  M. N. Roy’s writings by one of his close academician associates.
  • Ray, Sibnarayan. ed., Selected Works of M. N. Roy, vol. I, (Delhi: Oxford University Press, 1987).
    • Altogether four volumes have been published. The first volume contains an illuminating introduction written by the editor, another close academician associate of Roy.
  • Roy, M. N. and Spratt, Phillip.  Beyond Communism (Delhi: Ajanta Publications, 1981).
    • Shows Roy’s transition from Marxism to Humanism.
  • Roy, M. N.  India’s Message (Delhi: Ajanta Publications, 1982).
    • One of the books made out of the ‘Prison Manuscripts’. Published originally as the second volume of Fragments of a Prisoner’s Diary.  First volume was titled Memoirs of a Cat.
  • Roy, M. N.  Letters from Jail ( Calcutta: Renaissance Publishers Private Ltd., 1965).
    • Third volume of Fragments of a Prisoner’s Diary.  Letters written to his future wife and a close associate, Ellen Roy.
  • Roy, M. N.  Materialism (Calcutta: Renaissance Publishers Ltd., 1951).
    • From the ‘Prison Manuscripts’.
  • Roy, M. N.  M. N. Roy’s Memoirs (New Delhi: Ajanta Publications, 1983).
    • Covers a short period of six years from 1915.
  • Roy, M. N. New Humanism - A Manifesto (Delhi: Ajanta Publications, 1981).
    • Roy’s final ideas on humanism
  • Roy, M. N. New Orientation (Delhi: Ajanta Publications, 1982).
    • Transition from Marxism to Humanism.
  • Roy, M. N. Politics, Power and Parties (Delhi: Ajanta Publications, 1981).
    • Roy’s views on party-politics.
  • Roy, M. N. Reason, Romanticism and Revolution (Delhi: Ajanta Publications, 1989).
    • Last major work.
  • Roy, M. N. Science and Philosophy (Delhi: Ajanta Publications, 1984).
    • From the ‘Prison Manuscripts’.
  • Roy, M. N. Scientific Politics (Calcutta: Renaissance Publishers, 1947).
    • Transition from Marxism to Humanism

b. Secondary Sources

  • Karnik, V. B. M. N. Roy (New Delhi: National Book Trust, 1980).
    • A biography of Roy by one of his close associates.
  • Pal, R. M. ed., Selections from the Marxian Way and the Humanist Way (Delhi: Ajanta Publications, 2000).
    • Selections from the journal The Marxian Way and The Humanist Way (changed name), edited by Roy.
  • Ramendra. M. N. Roy’s New Humanism and Materialism (Patna: Buddhiwadi Foundation, 2001).
    • A critical study of Roy’s new humanism and materialism.
  • Ray, Sibnarayan, ed. M.N. Roy Philosopher-Revolutionary (New Delhi: Ajanta Publications, 1995).
    • Contains some writings of  M. N. Roy, but also writings of many others on Roy, including that of V. B. Karnik, Suddhindranath Datta, Ellen Roy, Laxman Shastri Joshi, Phillip Spratt, G. D. Parikh, Stanley Maron and H. J. Blackham.
  • Tarkunde, V. M.    Radical Humanism (New Delhi: Ajanta Publications, 1983).
    • An exposition of radical humanism by an intellectual-activist and a close associate of Roy.

Author Information

Ramendra Nath
Patna University

Angélique Arnauld (1591—1661)

The reforming abbess of the convent of Port-Royal, Mère Angélique Arnauld developed an Augustinian philosophy deeply influenced by the Jansenist movement.  Her philosophy of God follows the via negativa in its stress on God’s incomprehensibility.  Her theory of moral virtue is emphatically theocentric; even such natural virtues as patience are presented as emanations of grace.   The monastic virtues of poverty and humility receive pride of place in this account.  Reflecting her struggle with political and ecclesiastical authorities, Arnauld’s philosophy stresses the rights of women to education, to theological culture, to self-government, and to fidelity to personal conscience.  Although she affirms the existence of free will, Arnauld’s emphasis on the depth of human depravity and the dependence of the moral agent on divine grace for the execution of virtuous action bears the traces of theological determinism.  Long considered a minor voice in the Jansenist strand of Augustinian philosophy developed by Antoine Arnauld and Blaise Pascal, Angélique Arnauld’s original variations on Augustinianism have recently been underscored by feminist commentators.  The abbess’s gendered account of virtue is drawn from the experience of nuns committed to a strict contemplative life. Her defense of the rights of women to theological culture and opinion challenged the patriarchal commands issued by throne and altar that recommended religious silence for nuns.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Works
  3. Philosophical Themes
    1. Apophatic Theology
    2. Virtue Theory
    3. Theological Determinism
    4. Gender and Right
  4. Interpretation and Relevance
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Biography

Born on September 8, 1591, Jacqueline Marie Arnauld belonged to a prominent noblesse de robe family.  Both her father Antoine Arnauld and her mother Catherine Marion Arnauld descended from families renowned for their lawyers, parliamentarians, and diplomats.  Her grandfather Antoine Arnauld the Elder had battled the Jesuits in the parlement of Paris.  The family’s juridical culture and hostility to the Jesuits would durably mark the younger generation during the battle over Jansenism.

From her infancy, Jacqueline Marie Arnauld had been designated by the family as a future nun and superior.  In 1599 her maternal grandfather Simon Marion successfully obtained from King Henri IV the royal appointment of his niece as the abbess of Port-Royal, a Cistercian convent in the southwestern hinterlands of Paris. The family falsified the age of the abbatial nominee in documents sent to the Vatican in order to circumvent the requirements of canon law.  To receive the rudiments of religious education, Jacqueline Marie was sent to the decadent convent of Maubuisson, governed by the sister of the king’s mistress.  Despite the low level of education, the nascent abbess discovered Stoicism through her reading of Plutarch.  Now known by her religious name as Mère Marie-Angélique de Sainte-Magdalene [popularly as Mère Angélique], the young nun was formally installed as coadjutor abbess on April 10, 1602 and upon the death of Abbess Jeanne Boulehart on July 3, 1602, was declared the abbess of Port-Royal.  This childhood experience of forced vocations, trafficking in religious office, and perjury to attain social position would influence the mature Mère Angélique’s campaign to abolish just such abuses in the name of vocational freedom.

The eleven-year old abbess had inherited a lax convent containing scarcely a dozen nuns.  Liturgical offices had languished; sermons were rarely heard; the nuns entertained themselves by leisurely visits with the neighbors, masked balls, and elaborate decoration of their private apartments.  In 1608, Mère Angélique underwent a sudden conversion.  With the reluctant consent of her subjects, she launched the convent’s reform.  Her reforms included the abolition of private property and the institution of strictly communal property; the restoration of the rule of silence; the restoration of the night office; the institution of a vegetarian diet; the strict practice of cloister, with visitors relegated to a parlor divided by a grille.  The Angelican reform campaign reached a dramatic apogee on September 15, 1609, the journée du guichet, when Mère Angélique refused her own family admission to the convent.

Intellectual as well as moral, the Angelican reform also devoted itself to the development of a theological culture by the nuns.  Distinguished theologians, notably Archange de Pembroke, Benot de Canfield, and François de Sales, preached and lectured at the convent.  The philosophical and theological orientation of these preachers was clearly Augustinian rather than Thomistic.  This new Augustinian intellectual culture was reinforced by readings from Saint Augustine and Saint Bernard of Clairvaux at table and by the neo-Augustinian conferences on the spiritual life delivered by Mère Angélique herself.  During the Oratorian ascendancy (1626-33), when Oratorian priests served as the convent’s chaplains, Port-Royal fell under the influence of the mystical école française.  A disciple of the Pseudo-Dionysius, Pierre Bérulle defended apophatic theology, in which the negative attributes of the godhead are underscored; Charles Condren stressed the annihilation of self which is essential for union with God and authentic knowledge of the divine attributes.  The Oratorian themes of divine incomprehensibility and annihilation of the human subject clearly influenced Mère Angélique’s philosophy.

Under Mère Angélique’s direction, Port-Royal flourished as a model of reformed convent life.  In 1626, the convent opened a Parisian branch in the neighborhood adjacent to the Sorbonne.  In 1629, King Louis XIII approved one of the abbess’s most cherished reforms: the election of the abbess by the convent nuns themselves rather than by royal appointment; the term of office would now be fixed (three years) rather than lifetime.  The nuns elected Mère Geneviève Tardiff as Mère Angélique’s successor in 1630.  The new episcopal overseer of the convent, Bishop Sebastien Zamet, opposed Mère Angélique on the nature of conventual reform; the austere Angelican reform was soon replaced by more theatrical liturgies and greater intercourse with the Parisian lay elite.  The effort of Zamet and Mère Angélique to develop a new religious order, the ephemeral Institut du Saint-Sacrement (1633-36), ended in bitter failure.  The election of Mère Angélique’s sister Mère Agnès Arnauld as Port-Royal’s new abbess in 1636 permitted a swift return to the principles of the Angelican reform.  Appointed as novice mistress, Mère Angélique now focused on the spiritual and intellectual formation of younger community members.

The restoration of the Angelican reform also marked the transformation of Port-Royal into a bastion of Jansenism.  Jean de Hauranne, abbé de Saint-Cyran, became the convent chaplain.  A friend and disciple of Cornelius Jansen, Louvain theologian and bishop of Ypres, Saint-Cyran propagated the radical Augustinianism of Jansen through sermons, lectures, and spiritual direction.  Typical Jansenist themes included radical human depravity, the centrality of predestination, the small number of the elect, complete dependence on divine grace for salvation, and moral rigorism.  The imprisonment of Saint-Cyran (1638-43) initiated the French government’s campaign against the convent and its Jansenist theology, perceived as heretical and supportive of political dissidence.

In subsequent decades, the Jansenist orientation of Port-Royal intensified.  Devoted to meditation and scholarship, a community of laymen living in the environs of the convent (the solitaires) published the works of Augustine, Jansen, Saint-Cyran, and other authors favored by the Jansenists.   These works became the staples of the convent school curriculum and of the texts read aloud during convent meals.  The Arnauld family spearheaded the Jansenist movement.  Mère Angélique’s brother Antoine the Younger Arnauld emerged as the school’s leading theologian; her brother Henri Arnauld, bishop of Angers, defended Jansenism in the episcopate; her brother Robert Arnauld d’Andilly became the most prolific of the solitaire translators and editors.  Through correspondence Mère Angélique personally participated in the philosophical and theological disputes occasioned by Antoine Arnauld’s Frequent Communion (1643), Blaise Pascal’s Provincial Letters (1656), and Jean de Brisacier’s anti-Jansenist Jansenism Confounded (1651).

In 1661 Louis XIV intensified the campaign against Port-Royal.  The French government demanded that all clerics, teachers, and members of religious orders sign a statement in which they assented to the papacy’s condemnation of five heretical theses allegedly found in Jansen’s Augustinus.  To guide the perplexed conscience of Jansenists during “the crisis of the signature,” Antoine Arnauld developed the droit/fait distinction.  According to this distinction, the judgment of the church on matters of faith and morals (droit) binds the conscience of the faithful, since such judgments were essential to the church’s divine mission of guiding people to salvation.  On judgments of empirical fact (fait), however, the church’s judgment is fallible, open to subsequent alteration or even reversal.  Using the droit/fait distinction, the Jansenists could assent to the church’s condemnation of the five condemned theses concerning grace and freedom; however, they could not assent to what they considered the church’s erroneous judgment of fact that Jansen had actually defended these heretical theories.

Despite Mère Angélique’s efforts at intervention with civil and ecclesiastic authorities, the campaign of coercion against Port-Royal stiffened.  In April 1661 the throne closed the convent school and novitiate; the convent’s chaplain and confessors were exiled.  In June 1661 the nuns reluctantly signed the controversial statement concerning Jansen but they declared that they only offered a reserved assent, to be interpreted according to the droit/fait distinction.  At the urging of Louis XIV, the Vatican quickly annulled the reserved signature and demanded unconditional submission to all the church’s judgments in the controversy.

In the midst of the crisis Mère Angélique Arnauld died on August 6, 1661.

2. Works

From a philosophical perspective, two works written by Mère Angélique Arnauld merit particular attention.  They are her correspondence and a series of conferences she gave at Port-Royal.

Published in 1742-44 as the three-volume Letters of Reverend Mère Angélique Arnauld, Abbess and Reformer of Port-Royal [L], the massive correspondence of Mère Angélique includes more than thirteen hundred letters and more than one hundred correspondents.  Her letters to her scholarly brothers, Antoine Arnauld and Robert Arnauld d’Andilly, clearly express her philosophical Augustinianism.  She repeatedly declares herself a “disciple of Saint Augustine” and defends neo-Augustinian positions on the nature of virtue, the critique of casuistry, and the relationship between grace and freedom.  Her letters to her nephew Antoine Le Maître and her niece Angélique Arnauld d’Andilly present the abbess’s theories of the rights of the conscience and the limits of civil and ecclesiastical authority.  Numerous letters study the exercise of authority by women.  In her correspondence with fellow women superiors, Mère Angélique emphasizes the right of superiors to act as the convent’s principal spiritual director, including the right to appoint the convent’s chaplain and confessors and to instruct the nuns in theological matters germane to convent life.  Her extensive correspondence with Marie-Louise de Gonzague, queen of Poland, analyzes the virtues necessary for Christian women to govern others in the civic sphere and to endure reversals of fortune.

The correspondence also indicates Mère Angélique’s philosophical and theological culture.  Outside of the Bible, Saint Augustine is the author most cited in the letters; his Confessions are the work most frequently quoted.  The abbess often cites neo-Augustinian authors in the Jansenist circle: Saint-Cyran, Blaise Pascal, Antoine Arnauld, Pierre Nicole, Claude Lancelot, Antoine Singlin, and Antoine Le Maître.   Saint Teresa of Avila, whose works were translated into French by Robert Arnauld d’Andilly, is the most influential of the women authors cited by Mère Angélique, especially in her considerations on the exercise of authority by women.

Published in 1757, Speeches or Conferences of Reverend Mother Marie-Angélique Arnauld, Abbess and Reformer of Port-Royal [C] are transcriptions of the informal talks given by the abbess to the nuns at Port-Royal during the 1650s.  In these conferences the abbess often addresses moral issues pertinent to convent life.  She argues that it is intention rather than the quality of an act that determines the act’s moral worth.  Her severe judgments on minor ethical lapses by nuns and laity reflect the influence of Saint-Cyran’s moral rigorism.

Other major works by Mère Angélique include her autobiographical Report Written by Mère Angélique Arnauld, in which the abbess defends her policy of conventual reform, and her Commentary on the Rule of Saint Benedict, especially her discussion of the monastic virtue of humility.

3. Philosophical Themes

Angélique Arnauld develops philosophical arguments in three major areas: philosophy of God, especially the question of divine attributes; moral philosophy, in particular theory of the virtues; and gender theory, especially as it relates to the education and spiritual rights of women.  Arnauld’s philosophical reflection is subordinated to her larger theological project of Augustinian theology and reflects the distinctive culture of a convent devoted to the Jansenist cause.

a. Apophatic Theology

In her presentation of the divine attributes, Mère Angélique focuses on God’s incomprehensibility.  This apophatic theology stresses that what the human agent cannot grasp about the divine essence far surpasses what the human agent claims to know through positive images and concepts.

This incapacity to penetrate God’s essence stems from the stark alterity between divine and human natures.  “Everything God does is above human ability.  It is incomprehensible to our minds.  If we exist before God as if we were the smallest ants, is it so strange that we can neither know him nor grasp his intentions…. Between human beings and God there is no proportion.  They must acknowledge that God is a being infinitely superior to them.  As a result, it is impossible for them to know his ways” [C, 254].  Analogical affirmations of God’s attributes collapse in such an account of divine/human otherness.  The sinful nature of postlapsarian humanity deepens the chasm between humanity and God.  Only divine self-revelation can disclose a glimmer of God’s authentic nature to a human reason enticed by idols of its own imagination.

Arnauld’s apophatic theology underscores a particular dimension of divine incomprehensibility: inscrutability.  Although the Christian affirms the operation of divine providence in the ordering of the world, the accurate interpretation of God’s intention behind a particular historical act eludes human power.  “The judgments and ways of God are admirable.  Often God seems to want to destroy when he wants to edify.  What appears to be the result of his wrath and justice is actually the result of his mercy.  Blessed are the souls who perceive in every event only God’s holy will in order to submit to it” [L; to the Abbess of Gif; 23 December 1651].  Arnauld’s appeal to God’s inscrutability also expresses the voluntarist cast of her philosophy of God and of human nature.  It is divine sovereignty and self-abandonment to the divine will that are central in the convenant between God and the believer.

b. Virtue Theory

In her correspondence and conferences, Mère Angélique not only exhorts her public to the practice of virtue; she repeatedly defines the virtues in the context of monastic life.  Furthermore, she defends an Augustinian account of the moral virtues.  Authentic moral virtue can only spring from the operation of the theological virtues of faith, hope, and charity.  The theological virtues themselves are the gift of divine grace, not the creation of human endeavor.  Apparently natural virtues, such as the cardinal virtue of courage, are only the masks of pride.

Arnauld’s discussion of the virtues privileges those moral habits typical of conventual life.  Rooted in the monastic vow of poverty, the virtue of poverty not only renounces personal possessions and cultivates sympathy for the materially poor; it refuses all aesthetic pleasures, even those found in liturgical arts and ceremonies.  Contempt for the world inevitably provokes persecution by the world.  “Many graces of God are required in order to disdain the world and tolerate its disdain for us….It is impossible for us to hate the world without the world hating us and considering us fools” [L; To Mademoiselle de Luzanci; September 7, 1650].  The centerpiece of monastic virtue, piety demands complete oblation of oneself.  Authentic piety requires total abolition of human personal desire as one obeys the divine will.  “God has given everything to humanity so it will give everything to him.  By this sacrifice it obtains from God’s goodness the grace to possess him and to reign with him forever” [L; to Marie-Louise de Gonzague, queen of Poland; November 12, 1655].  The moral rigorism typical of the Jansenist movement marks this account of the nature of the prominent virtues in monastic life.  Militant opposition to the world accompanies every authentic expression of moral virtue.

The theocentric framework of Arnauld’s virtue theory also appears in her analysis of more secular virtues.  Patience is rooted in the recognition of our grave sinfulness before God.  Tolerating the imperfections of others prevents us from descending into moral complacency and the illusion of personal perfection.  “To avoid falling, we must humbly tolerate the faults of others and of ourselves.  We are born in sin and we will be totally liberated from it only at the moment of our death” [L; to Madame Allen; May 12, 1665].  Even the Socratic virtue of self-knowledge undergoes theological reconstruction.  The moral self-knowledge granted by divine grace surpasses any self-knowledge acquired by the natural means of reflection.  “If you had spent an entire year making an examination of conscience with the most meticulous care, it would have been inferior to the moment when God touched your heart.  You could not have been as well prepared and you could not have known your faults as well as you do right now without any personal examination of conscience.  It is grace alone that can grant us such knowledge” [L; to Anne de Rohan, Princess de Guéménée; November 15, 1629].  Authentic self-knowledge thus emerges as a product of divine illumination.

Arnauld’s analysis of the moral virtues affirms a traditional tenet of Augustinian virtue theory: that the allegedly natural virtues praised by pagan philosophers are in fact disguised vices and that authentic moral virtue is rooted in the theological virtues grafted into the human will by divine grace.   Following the Augustinian perspective, Mère Angélique dismisses the neoclassical virtues of magnanimity and courage as masks of self-satisfaction.  “There is nothing more pleasant for a generous person than the act of giving.  People so possess courage according to the world’s standard fear nothing so much as asking for something.  It is characteristic of the rich to give and the poor to receive” [C, 71].  It is selfless intention, rather than external act, that is the criterion for the existence of authentic virtue.  Only the presence of the divinely infused virtues of faith, hope, and charity can provide the proper theocentric motivation for the exercise of the moral virtues.  Arnauld’s analysis of these theological virtues expresses her typical rigorism.  Faith plunges the moral agent into combat against the world, the flesh, and the devil.  Authentic hope turns the believer against the sinful hope of domination that poisons the courtier.  Charity demands the annihilation of the self.  “Charity is nothing other than the love of God and the love of God is an ardent desire that God reign in everything and that all creatures annihilate themselves and recognize his supreme grandeur and infinite majesty” [C, 77].

Reflecting the Jansenist combat with the French throne and episcopate, Mère Angélique stresses the virtue of suffering for the truth.  Under persecution, this virtue of sacrificial witness to the truth has become the hallmark of the convent’s moral character.  “I am overwhelmed by the vision I have of the great and singular grace God has granted us to suffer for the truth, trying to serve the souls he has redeemed by his death” [L; to Antoine Arnauld; early 1644].  This suffering for the contested truths of salvation, however, must be animated by the theological virtue of charity.  Mère Angélique censures the sarcasm that has increasingly stained the polemical defenses of the convent by Jansenist sympathizers.  “I only desire that God may deign to fill you deeply, not only with the knowledge of the truth, but with a perfect love that you practice faithfully and that gives you a humble patience toward everything.  The current impassioned applause from so many people disturbs me” [C; to Antoine Arnauld; April 1644].  To be authentic, even the convent’s distinctive willingness to suffer persecution for the sake of doctrinal truth must remain rooted in the infused virtue of charity toward one’s opponents.

c. Theological Determinism

Angélique Arnauld’s heavy emphasis on divine grace as the cause of all virtuous action often appears close to a species of theological determinism.  So central is the initiative and sovereignty of God in all cosmic and moral activity that free will appears to disappear.  Human beings remain voluntaristic beings inasmuch as they can choose one course of action over another after deliberation, but the deliberative and elective activities appear destined by concupiscence to involve the selection of evil unless divine grace intervenes through an inscrutable decree of divine providence.

The abbess reinforces this theological determinism by her insistence on the Augustinian doctrine of predestination.  The salvation of sinners, illustrated through the conversion of the good thief by Jesus on the cross, is due entirely to divine initiative, not to the personal merit of the saved.  “God grants his grace to whomever he pleases.  This is seen in the prayer of the thief he touched and converted in the very act of sinning.  At first he blasphemed just like the other thief; nevertheless, one is taken and the other is left behind.  Jesus Christ gazes at the former with his great mercy and leaves the latter by an effect of justice that condemns him” [C, 108].  Moral conversion and the concomitant status of being saved are caused uniquely by divine election.

Reinforcing the Augustinian framework of predestination, Arnauld rejects the compromise solution of human cooperation with divine grace.  The abbess insists on the comprehensive nature of divine causation in the act of salvation.  “The creature could never cooperate with the grace of God.  It would lose infinitely more than it could keep for its use.  God’s grace always suffered some loss when it came to us….The creature’s incapacity stems from sin, which is infinitely opposed to this grace” [C, 365].  It is in her discussions of grace and salvation that the theological determinism of Mère Angélique becomes the most pronounced.

Arnauld’s emphasis on divine causation is not without paradox.  The abbess repeatedly exhorts her listeners and correspondents to act virtuously and to seek God’s favor, as if they exercised authentic free will and responsibility.  But these appeals to moral reform find scant justification in a metaphysics and a moral philosophy that make divine volition the unique cause of physical and ethical action.

d. Gender and Right

The convent is not simply the site for the elaboration of Mère Angélique’s Augustinian philosophy; her corpus defends the right of women, specifically of nuns, to exercise judgments of conscience on matters of theological dispute, even when this entails conflict with political and religious authorities.  It also defends the correlative rights of women to education, to theological culture, and to limited autonomy through the selection of superiors and of constitutional law.

In many writings, Arnauld analyzes how women should exercise their rightful authority in the religious and civic spheres.  Despite the rigorism of her moral views, Mère Angélique argues that flexibility is central in a religious superior’s exercise of authority.  Women superiors must tailor their judgments to the needs of the individual subject.  “Superiors must be extremely reserved in all their words.  They must  weigh all of them according to the golden measure of holy charity.  Whether they are exhorting, reproving, or consoling, they must proportion themselves to the capacity of each soul” [L; to the Anonciade superior in Boulogne; May 14, 1640].  Authentic conventual governance involves respect of each individual’s experience and of the superior’s personal judgment in a particular case.

Legalism constitutes a particular danger for this exercise of personalized spiritual governance.  Mère Angélique criticizes the tendency of overly detailed constitutions in religious orders to suffocate the right of women superiors to exercise substantial freedom in the governance of their subjects.  “In the area of penances, it seems to me that one should usually grant freedom to a superior to act according to her inclinations.  She must try to take into account the spirit of God and the different circumstances and not try to regulate all the nuns according to the same manner.  The letter kills and the spirit gives life” [L; to Monsieur Macquet; January 4, 1635].  These counsels on the proper exercise of authority religious superiors reinforce the principal provisions of the Angelican reform of the convent.  Nuns are to elect their own superiors and to draw up their constitutions and legislation in chapter.  Superiors are to act as the principal spiritual directors of their subjects with the authority to appoint chaplains and to direct schools and retreat programs for laywomen.

In her extensive correspondence with Marie-Louise de Gonzague, queen of Poland, Arnauld evokes the virtues central for the exercise of civil authority by women.  Like nuns, monarchs must practice the annihilation of self that unites the believer completely to God.  “God will treat you in his judgment just as you have treated him here.  He will honor those who have honored him as their sovereign lord, considering themselves nothing at all before his divine majesty” [L; to Marie-Louis de Gonzague, queen of Poland; January 20, 1655].  In particular, the queen must practice the love of enemies, a theological virtue that proves especially difficult in time of war.  “Your soul should often ponder these words of Our Lord Jesus Christ when he was nailed to the cross in the last extremity and by the most horrible malice and cruelty that could be imagined: ‘Father, forgive them; they did not know what they do.’  It was not only those who crucified the Son of God who did not know that he was the king of glory; it is those who make war on you” [L; to Marie-Louise de Gonzague de Poland; November 5, 1655].

As the persecution of Port-Royal intensified, Mère Angélique insisted on the right and duty of women to follow an informed conscience on the theological disputes of the moment.  Appeals to obedience cannot force a nun to assent to a judgment by a political or ecclesiastical authority she believes to be erroneous.  Citing the precedent of Teresa of Avila, Arnauld urges Queen Anne of Austria, the French queen-mother, to intervene on behalf of the Port-Royal nuns against the errors of the church on the question of Jansenism.  “I believe that God will use the wisdom of Your Majesty and the wisdom of the king, as he used Phillip II, the ancestor of Your Majesty, in the past, to save Saint Teresa from the greatest persecution she had ever known.  We see in her writings that even the pope had been wrongly informed about her and the nuns of her order and that his nuncio had been prejudiced against her, thus pushing this conflict, in her own words, to the last step of violence” [L; to Anne of Austria, queen-mother of France; May 25, 1661].  Against the fallible, prudential judgments of both church and state on matters of fact, both nuns and laywomen enjoyed the right to challenge judgments that appeared to wound truth and charity.

4. Interpretation and Relevance

Several factors have impeded a properly philosophical appreciation of the works of Angélique Arnauld.  First, apologists for Jansenism have long argued that Mère Angélique was simply ignorant of the theological controversies erupting during the crisis of the signature.  Gazier’s defense of the Port-Royal nuns (1929) is typical of such apologetic.  Furthermore, Mère Angélique’s spirituality has often been described as practical, more interested in moral than speculative issues.  Undoubtedly, Mère Angélique never read Jansen’s Augustinus.  But she had certainly read Jansen’s Reformation of the Interior Man, translated by her brother Robert Arnauld d’Andilly from the Latin original, and she had studied Saint-Cyran’s Popular Theology, a summary of Jansenist doctrine that served as the convent school’s major catechetical reference.  The misleading portrait of Mère Angélique as a theological innocent baffled by the intricacies of the ecclesiastical quarrel over grace has long closed her canon to philosophical commentary.

Second, the thought of Mère Angélique has often been simply assimilated to the Augustinianism of the male leaders of the Jansenist movement.  While the abbess was clearly influenced by the constellation of Augustinian thinkers who surrounded her, especially her brother Antoine Arnauld and her mentor Saint-Cyran, she maintains her own distinctive voice in this school of radical Augustinianism.  Her analysis of monastic virtue in a conventual context and her defense of the spiritual rights of women against political and ecclesiastical coercion reflect her own theoretical and gendered priorities.

Finally, the philosophy of Mère Angélique has been obscured by its forbidding theological architecture.  The abbess expresses her theories in monastic genres foreign to the philosophical treatise: letters of spiritual direction, abbatial conferences, and commentaries on patristic texts.  The substantive issues which preoccupied her appear similarly foreign to contemporary philosophy.  Her philosophy of divine attributes, moral virtue, and personal rights are embedded in quarrels over grace and monastic reform that can appear arcane.  Philosophical analysis of her works requires a grasp of the early modern theological controversies which provided the occasion for the abbess’s philosophical speculation.

The current revival of interest in the philosophy of Angélique Arnauld is fueled in large part by the feminist effort to expand the cannon of the humanities in the early modern period.  Mère Angélique’s defense of the rights of women to exercise religious and political authority has emerged as a central interest in contemporary commentary on her own writings.  Kostroun’s study of Port-Royal (2003) focuses on the gendered subversion of authority justified by Mère Angélique and her associates.

5. References and Further Reading

All French to English translations above are by the author of this article.

a. Primary Sources

  • Arnauld, Mère Angélique. Entretiens ou conférences de la Révérende Mère Marie-AngéliqueArnauld, abbesse et réformatrice de Port-Royal (Brussels: A. Boudet, 1757).
    • [Transcribed largely by her niece Soeur Angélique de Saint-Jean Arnauld d’Andilly, this series of conferences delivered in the 1650s at Port-Royal expresses the moral rigorism of the abbess.]
  • Arnauld, Mère Angélique. Lettres de la Révérende Mère Marie-Angélique Arnauld, abbesse et réformatrice de Port-Royal, 3 vols. (Utrechet: Aux dépens de la Compagnie, 1742-44).
    • [The facsimile edition of this collection of Mère Angélique’s letters produced by Phénix Éditions in 2003 contains an excellent introduction by Jean Lesaulnier, who identifies the various networks of correspondents with the abbess.]
  • Arnauld, Mère Angélique. Rélation écrite par la Mère Angélique Arnauld, ed. Louis Cognet (Paris: Grasset, 1949).
    • [This autobiographical text is an apologetic for the Angelican reform of Port-Royal and a description of the burgeoning persecution of the convent and the Jansenist movement.]

b. Secondary Sources

  • Bugnion-Secrétan, Perle. La Mère Angélique Arnauld, 1591-1661, après ses écrits (Paris: Cerf, 1991).
    • [This biography of the abbess focuses on her writings, with particular attention to their polemical context.]
  • Chédeozeau, Bernard. “Idéal intellectuel et vie monastique à Port-Royal,” Chroniques de Port-Royal 37 (1997), 57-74.
    • [This article examines the intellectual culture developed at Port-Royal under the Angelican reform and compares it favorably to the anti-intellectual piety dominating most of the convents of the period.]
  • Conley, John J. Adoration and Annihilation: The Convent Philosophy of Notre Dame (Notre Dame, IN: University of Notre Dame Press, 2009), 43-112.
    • [This chapter analyzes and critiques the neo-Augustinian philosophy developed by the abbess in her letters and conferences.]
  • Gastellier, Fabian, Angélique Arnauld (Paris: Fayard, 1998).
    • [This biography studies the politics of the abbess’s civil and ecclesiastical context.]
  • Gazier, Cécile. Histoire du monastére de Port-Royal (Paris: Perrin, 1929).
    • [This pro-Janenist apologetic history depicts a theologically uncultured Mère Angélique, baffled by the arcane doctrinal disputes by which the enemies of Port-Royal attempted to destroy the convent through charges of heresy.]
  • Kostroun, Daniella. “A Formula for Disobedience: Jansenism, Gender, and the Feminist Paradox,” Journal of Modern History 75 (2003), 483-522.
    • [This article analyzes the subversive nature of the gendered arguments employed by Mère Angélique and her associates against royal and episcopal demands to submission on matters of conscience.]
  • Rowan, Mary. “Angélique Arnauld’s Web of Feminine Friendships: Letters to Jeanne de Chantal and the Queen of Poland,” in Les femmes au grand siècle; le Baroque; Musique et littérature; Music et liturgie, ed. David Wetsel et al. (Tübingen: Narr, 2003), 53-59.
    • [This study of the abbess’s correspondence focuses on her relationship with two prominent women who exercised authority in the religious and civic spheres respectively.]

Author Information

John J. Conley
Loyola University in Maryland
U. S. A.

Ninon de Lenclos (1620—1705)

LenclosA salonnière during the reign of Louis XIV, Ninon de Lenclos embodied libertinism in both theory and practice.  As a notorious courtesan, Lenclos scandalized France by her numerous affairs with prominent statesmen and ecclesiastics.  As a philosopher, she justified sexual license by her naturalistic theories of human nature and of morality.  In Lenclos’s perspective, the human person is demonstrably a part of material nature.  Allegedly spiritual human experiences, love in particular, are only a sophisticated variation on animal instincts.  Rather than being a pursuit of spiritualized virtue, human moral conduct is the effort to expand pleasure and to eliminate pain.  Within the hierarchy of pleasures, romantic love constitutes the pinnacle.  Lenclos condemns the ascetical ethics of monastic Christianity and of Platonism because it has exalted a spiritualized love which is illusory and impossible to practice.  In her mechanistic theory of the world, material causation is responsible for many of the intellectual and volitional activities other philosophers wrongly attribute to an immaterial soul.  Through her naturalistic metaphysics and her ethics of the primacy of pleasure, Lenclos contributed to the Epicurean revival of the French Renaissance.  In her insistence on the equal rights of women and men to the pursuit of pleasure, Lenclos developed a gendered version of Epicureanism which challenged her society’s subordination of women to men.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Works
  3. Epicurean Philosophy
    1. Theory of Love
    2. Ethics of Pleasure
    3. Metaphysical Naturalism
    4. Gender Critique
  4. Reception and Interpretation
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Biography

Anne de Lenclos was born in Paris on November 10, 1620, and she died on October 17, 1705. She was nicknamed “Ninon” by her father. Her family was philosophically divided.  A devout Catholic, her mother attempted to raise the precocious daughter according to the strict moral standards of Counter-Reformational Catholicism.  A neo-Epicurean, her father introduced her to a more skeptical world outlook and to a libertine code of ethics.  From an early age, Ninon clearly sided with her father’s perspective.

A child prodigy, Ninon de Lenclos enchanted Parisian salons with her mastery of the lute and clavichord.  She mastered multiple foreign languages, including Spanish and Italian.  A voracious reader, she maintained a life-long affection for her favorite philosopher, Montaigne.

During her teen years, Lenclos began her career as one of Paris’s most celebrated courtesans.  During her many public affairs, she became the mistress of numerous prominent men.  Statesmen included the Grand Condé, Gaston de Cligny; Louis de Mornay, marquis de Villarceaux; and François, duc de la Rochefoucauld.  Clergy included the Abbé de Chateauneuf and Canon Gédoyn.  Cardinal Richelieu counted among one of her spurned petitioners.

If Lenclos’s bold libertinism titillated the more skeptical salons, it scandalized the capital’s devout circles.  Queen Anne of Austria, regent of France, placed Lenclos under house arrest at the Convent of the Madelonnettes in 1656.  Thanks to the intervention of the exiled Christine, Queen of Sweden, who visited Lenclos in her convent cell, Lenclos was quickly freed from the convent and returned to her life as a courtesan.

Starting in 1667, Lenclos conducted a salon at the Hôtel de Sagonne in Paris.  Major philosophical writers participating in the salon included the Cartesian Fontenelle and a group of neo-Epicurean authors: Charles de Saint-Évremond; Antoine Gombaud, chevalier de Méré; and Damien Mitton.  The religious skepticism of this circle permeated the libertine atmosphere of Lenclos’s salon.  Prominent literary figures included the aphorist François de la Rochefoucauld; the fabulist Jean de La Fontaine; the memorialist Louis de Rouvroy, duc de Saint-Simon; the chronicler Roger de Rabutin, comte de Bussy; the poet Jean Chapelle; the dramatist Jean Racine; and the literary critic Nicolas Boileau.  Lenclos was especially close to Molière, whose anticlerical Tartuffe received an earlier reading in her salon.  Other artists included the painter Nicolas Mignard and the musical composer Jean-Baptiste Lully.  One of the central members of the salon was Henri de Sévigné, the husband of the famous epistoler; the correspondence between the Marquis de Sévigné and Lenclos would survive as Lenclos’s major piece of philosophical reflection.  Numerous women also participated in the salon.  Notable female authors included Marguerite de la Sablière; Henriette de Coligny, comtesse de la Suze; and Françoise d’Aubigné, the future Madame de Maintenon and morganatic wife of Louis XIV.

Over the decades, Lenclos’s salon became a protected meeting place for those who treated Christianity with skepticism and who championed a neo-Epicurean ethics of pleasure, with romantic love canonized as the supreme good.  Lenclos impressed her guests with her wit and her defense of a life devoted to the pursuit of refined pleasure without conventional religious restraints.  To the outrage of the devout, she presented lectures on love, with detailed counsels on romantic conquest and disentanglement.  Female students were admitted for free; male students paid tuition.  A generous patron of authors in need, she provided the young Voltaire with a substantial gift for the purchase of books in her will and testament.

2. Works

The major extant philosophical work of Lenclos is found in her correspondence.  In 1750, Crébillon fils published a posthumous collection of Lenclos’s correspondence with the Marquis de Sévigné [LMDS].  In the letters,  Lenclos details her philosophy of love and the naturalistic metaphysics and ethics underpinning it.  Lenclos conducted a later correspondence (1697-1702) with Saint-Évremond, a neo-Epicurean friend and disciple of Gassendi.  First published in 1752, these letters express her views on aging and death.

A 1659 pamphlet, The Coquette Avenged, has long been attributed to her.  This brief work defends the possibility of a virtuous life independent of all formal religious influence.  Contemporary literary scholars doubt that Lenclos is the actual author of this work, but it does express the secularist moral philosophy which characterized Lenclos and her inner salon circle.

3. Epicurean Philosophy

Throughout her career, Lenclos declared herself a disciple of Epicurus. In a letter to her, Saint-Évremond defines the neo-Epicurean creed of their milieu:

It would be useless to press the arguments, repeated a hundred times by the Epicureans, that the love of pleasure and the abolition of pain are the primary and most natural inclinations noticed in all people.  Wealth, power, honor, and virtue contribute to our happiness, but the enjoyment of pleasure, let us call it voluptuousness, to sum up everything in a word, is the true aim and purpose to which all human acts are inclined. (Letter to the modern Leontium)

For Lenclos, the activity of love is the clearest human manifestation of the fundamental inclination to maximize pleasure and to minimize pain.  Rather than the virtues, it is the passions which dominate the human will in its moral choices.  Natural inclination determines psychological interaction as surely as it does the physical interaction of bodies.  In exploring the romantic pursuit of pleasure, Lenclos argues for the fundamental equality and reciprocity between the genders.

a. Theory of Love

The sentiment of love is predominantly an instinct.  It is a passion which owes little to reason.  “The precise truth is that love is just a blind instinct which one must personally experience in order to appreciate it.  It is an appetite which one has for one object in preference to another.  One is not able to provide reasons for why one has this particular taste (LMDS no. 2).”  The instinctual and emotive nature of love precludes rational justification for its emergence and development.

Lenclos stresses the sensate nature of love.  The stereotyped practices of the lover indicate the sensual nature of the passion and its associated states.  “Now tell me honestly: If your love were not the work of the senses, would you experience such pleasure in pondering that form, those eyes you find so beguiling, that mouth which you describe to me in such glowing colors (LMDS no. 11)?”  While friendship may be contracted with many different types of people, love maintains a close connection with physical attraction.  The obsessions common to the state of love indicate its sensate framework.

The attempt to tie the phenomenon of love to human reason leads to illusion.  Especially damaging is the effort to refine love according to the canons of chivalry.

If you attempt to walk in the footsteps of our ancient heroes of the romances and attempt to develop great and restrained sentiments, you will soon discover that this alleged heroism only turns love into a sad and occasionally lethal folly.  Love in fact is fanaticism.  If you separate it from the romantic baggage public opinion has added to it, it will soon give you its proper sort of pleasure and happiness.  Trust me: If it were reason that designed the affairs of the heart, love would be insipid (LMDS no. 4).

Divorced from its distinctive emotive violence, love would disappear and deteriorate into simple affection based on convenience or calculation.

Love also eludes moral subordination.  It is basically an amoral passion.  The characterization of the moral character of an amorous experience is the responsibility of the moral agent who has undergone it.  “Love is a passion which is neither good nor bad in and of itself.  Only those who have been affected by it can decide whether it is good or evil (LMDS no. 8).”

Especially illusory is the effort to conflate love with moral virtue.  Despite efforts to subordinate love to virtue, love will govern even the most virtuous person as the natural instinct which it is.

Oh, you mortals, who rely so much on the power of your virtue!  No matter how great your strength may be, there are moments when the most virtuous person becomes the weakest.  The reason for this strange fact is that nature is always pursuing us.  It is always aiming to achieve its ends.  The desire for love in a woman is a substantial part of her natural constitution; her virtue has only been patched on (LMDS no. 10).

The effort to present love as a virtue masks the fundamental fact that love is a natural instinct, accountable to neither intellect nor will.  Ascetical efforts to eliminate the arational dimensions of love will fail, given this natural inclination’s violent claim over the human person.

Since love can be explained by natural causation, it should be the object of neither praise nor blame.  It is no more moral or immoral than the human instinct toward hydration and nutrition.  “If I were you, I would not speculate on whether it is a good or bad thing to fall in love.  I would rather have you speculate on whether it is good or bad to be thirsty, or whether it should be forbidden to give someone a drink just because some people might end up inebriated (LMDS no.9).”  The natural causation of human love justifies Lenclos’s sexual libertinism.  Like other natural impulses, sexual desire should be discussed in an objective, non-moral way.  The possible distortions of this impulse should not lead to a moral censure of it or an attempt to repress it.

Lenclos’s naturalistic theory of the origin of love often uses mechanistic rhetoric.  Echoing Descartes, Lenclos perceives amorous desire as the reflex reactions of the body-machine to external stimuli.  “We have our need to have our emotions stimulated.  Connected to our emotions is our basic physical machinery.  This machinery is the ultimate and necessary cause of love (LMDS no. 8).”  This mechanistic account of the origin and nature of human love reinforces Lenclos’s critique of efforts to rationalize or moralize what is simply a powerful natural instinct.  Attempts to locate love’s origins in the allegedly spiritual faculties of intellect and will not only obscure its actual material roots; they ground ethical codes of love which mandate an unrealistic regulation of a powerful and necessary impulse.

b. Ethics of Pleasure

According to Lenclos, love is only the highest of goods in the hierarchy of pleasures which human beings pursue.  “All that I can say in favor of love is that it gives us a greater pleasure than any of the other comforts of life.  It pulls us out of our routines and stirs us up.  It is love which satisfies one of our most urgent needs (LMDS no.8).”  An authentic moral compass gauges the greater pleasures and the greater pains in light of the natural human inclinations which demand satisfaction.  Herein lies the authentic path of human happiness.

Although love represents the highest pleasure known to the mature adult, it is a complex pleasure, often bearing concomitant pain.

When I spoke about temper I only meant the type which gives a stronger attraction, anxiety, and a little jealousy: that, in a word, which springs from love alone and not from any natural vulgarity, the vulgarity we often call ‘bad temper.’  When it is love that makes a woman difficult, when that alone is the cause of her prickliness, how can a lover be so insensitive as to complain about it?  Don’t those rough spots only demonstrate the violence of this passion?  Personally, I have always believed that those lovers who try to keep themselves within reasonable bounds are not completely in love.  Can we really be in love without permitting ourselves to be pushed on by the fire of a consuming impetuosity, without experiencing all the commotion it necessarily causes?  No, without any doubt (LMDS no.5)!

The mental and physical anguish provoked by the experience of authentic love is only a necessary dolor intrinsic to the greater pleasure of love itself.  In fact, this violent moodiness constitutes one of the darker pleasures for the connoisseurs of sophisticated passion.

Love’s mixed pleasure is especially challenging for women.  The contemporary Frenchwoman suffers from two social desires springing from romantic love: the desire to make her romantic conquest known by others and the desire to avoid censure by society.

A woman is always trying to balance two irreconcilable passions which continually agitate her soul: the desire to please and the fear of dishonor.  You can easily recognize our embarrassment.  On the one hand, we are consumed with the desire to have an audience to notice the effect of our charms….We would like the entire world to witness the favors we encounter and the homage paid to us….We enjoy the despair of our rivals and the indiscretions which betray the sentiments we inspire in others.  We are delighted in proportion to the extent of the misery they suffer….But such sweet pleasures bring great bitterness….A sober and reasonable woman always prefers her reputation to romantic celebrity (LMDS no. 23).

The social context of love in the era of the salon complicates its mixed pleasures.  The desire to be acclaimed as a triumphant courtesan, enjoying the rarified pleasure of revenge on one’s rivals, conflicts with the desire to maintain one’s moral status in a civil society which swiftly punishes the least trace of sexual transgression.  The pleasure of sexual conquest contests the more sober pleasure of social esteem.

In her defense of an ethics of pleasure, Lenclos criticizes the dominant ethics of virtue.  Led by the Platonists, philosophers have long mistakenly transformed the natural inclination of love, dominated by the axis of pain and pleasure, into the moralized field of virtue and vice.

Isn’t love a passion?  Don’t very upright people argue that the passions and the vices are the same thing?  Is vice ever more seductive than when it wears the cloak of virtue?  In order to corrupt virtuous souls, it is sufficient for the alleged vice of love to appear in potential form.  The Platonists deified love in an idealized form.  In every age, in order to justify the passions, it was necessary to apotheosize them.  What am I saying here?  Am I so forward as to play the iconoclast with a prestigious superstition?  Such temerity!  Don’t I deserve to be attacked by all women for questioning their favorite cult (LMSD no.27)?

Both the condemnation of love as a vice and the exaltation of Platonic love to a virtue mask the material origins and nature of the amatory impulse.  The contemporary morals of love occult the amoral nature of this mechanical inclination and delude moral agents into the censure of all carnal romance or into the pursuit of an impossibly rarified love emptied of all passion.

In her critique of the ethics of virtue, Lenclos attacks the moral asceticism that has long distorted the practice of love in France.  Both Christianity and philosophy bear responsibility for the refusal to accord pleasure its natural rights in the human experience of love.

How I pity our good ancestors!  What they thought was a mortal weariness and a melancholic madness we consider a joyous folly and a delightful delirium.  They were fools.  They preferred the austerities of deserts and rocks to the pleasures of a garden bursting with flowers.  The habit of reflection has visited such prejudices upon us (LMDS no.8).

Christian and philosophical asceticism has not only attempted to eradicate sexual pleasure by considering love as a vice; it has turned all the pleasures of civilization into a temptation to be shunned in favor of the hermit-like illusions of the desert.

c. Metaphysical Naturalism

Lenclos’s treatment of love as a natural impulse is part of a broader naturalist metaphysics. The workings of nature, often conceived in mechanistic terms, cause many of the human actions wrongly interpreted as the offspring of a spiritual intellect or will.

The itinerary of romantic love indicates the all-embracing power of this natural causation.  A romantic affair which begins in the illusion that it is the artifice of refined virtue quickly reveals its debt to the imperious powers of nature.

At the beginning of their affair, lovers fancy themselves inspired by the noblest and most refined sentiments.  They exhaust their ingenuity, exaggerations, and the gushing of the most exquisite metaphysics.  For a period they are intoxicated with the belief that their love is of a superior nature.  But let us follow them as their affair unfolds.  Nature quickly recovers its rights and re-assumes its influence.  Soon enough, vanity, tired by the effusions of such an exalted purpose, leaves the heart free to express its feelings without any restraint.  The day arrives when these lovers become dissatisfied with the pleasures of love.  After having traveled a long circuit, they are surprised to find themselves at the very point where a peasant, following the inclinations of nature, would have begun (LMDS no. 9).

Even the most exalted romantic itinerary ultimately reveals its debt to the same forces of nature which control the amorous urges of the most illiterate peasant.  Nature, rather than soul, controls human action.

Love is not the only area where nature manifests its blind hold over human desire and action.  Nature determines the entire spectrum of objects to which the human person is attracted in its moral deliberations.  “In forming us, nature gave us a certain range of sentiments, which must expend themselves upon some particular object (LMDS no. 2).”  The predictable objects of desire for the various human instincts indicate how determinative nature has been in the constitution of the human person.

This naturalistic metaphysics is often presented in mechanistic terms.  The phenomenon of love is only the most prominent of the activities by which the human body reveals its fundamental nature as a machine whose internal instincts are manipulated by appropriate external stimuli.  “We women enter the world with this necessity of loving undefined.  If we take one man in preference to another, let us honestly admit that we yield less to some knowledge of merit than to some mechanical instinct, which is nearly always blind (LMDS no.14).”  The mechanistic nature of human deliberation and interaction is only masked by philosophical efforts to attribute such functions to a chimerical soul.

d. Gender Critique

In her analysis of love, Lenclos criticizes the roles assigned each gender in contemporary France.  She insists that the psychological qualities of men do not differ from those of women.  Furthermore, she insists that for love to yield its maximum pleasure, men must learn to treat women with a respect they have heretofore denied them.

In the dominant social prejudices of her era, men and women were perceived as fundamentally different in psyche as in body.  In romantic intercourse, women were to be pleasant and amusing; men were to be intellectual and commanding.  Lenclos argues, however, that the arts of politeness are as necessary for men as they are for women.

It is not because you [Marquis de Sévigné and other men] possess superior qualities that you are an agreeable companion….To be embraced with outstretched arms, you must be sympathetic, amusing, important to the pleasure of others.  I warn you that you cannot succeed in any other manner, especially with women.  Now tell me, what would you like me to do with your learning, with the geometry of your mind, and with the exactitude of your memory?  Dear Marquis, if you only have such advantages, if you have no personal charm to balance your austerity, you will not please women.  I can vouch for that.  Far from pleasing them, you will seem to them like an intimidating critic.  You will so constrain them that any pleasure they might have enjoyed in your presence will be banished (LMDS no. 7).

For romantic love to flourish, reciprocity must reign between the two partners.  Men as well as women must cultivate the gentle arts of charm, flirtation, and fascination.  The sexual stereotype of the emotional woman and the rational man must be abolished in favor of a more egalitarian vision of both genders called to develop both their intellectual and affective personalities.

In her critique of masculine misperceptions of women, Lenclos argues that men must learn to treat women as they themselves would like to be treated.  She criticizes the Marquis de Sévigné for his misinterpretation of the reactions of a countess he is seeking to conquer romantically.  Men must learn to empathize with the complex emotions women experience in the adventure of romantic love; like men, women must balance physical desire with public reputation.

A man without prejudice would see in the countess only a lover as reasonable as she is tender.  Without stressing virtue, she remains attached to her reputation. In short, she is a woman who seeks to reconcile love and duty.  The difficulty in allying these two contrary qualities is not slight.  It is the source of the complexities which wound you.  You yourself should imagine the battles she must sustain, the upheavals she endures, and the embarrassment she must be suffering on account of a lover who is too easily put off by signs of resistance (LMDS no. 43).

The masculine attempt to overwhelm women by a display of force and by a refusal to negotiate patiently destroys the possibility of authentic romance.  In respecting the psychological complexity of women, a complexity more similar to that of men than men would usually imagine, men can both maximize their chance of romantic success and place the desired woman in a position of equality.

4. Reception and Interpretation

Lenclos’s long life as a bold courtesan, cheerfully mating prominent aristocrats and clerics of Parisian high society, has long overshadowed her contribution to philosophy.  Most biographies detail the remarkable beauty of this courtesan into her eightieth year, her colorful affairs, and the scandals of her libertine salon.  A series of artists have fictionalized her as the courtesan par excellence.  In the nineteenth century, Henrion Ragueneau de la Chainaye wrote the drama Ninon de l’Enclos: comédie historique en un acte and Eugène de Mirecourt published the novel Mémoires de Ninon de Lenclos.  In the twentieth century, director Abel Gance featured her in his film Cyrano et D’Artagnan and the cartoonist Patrick Cothias turned her into a comic spy in his graphic novels, especially Ninon secrète.  An exception to this emphasis on scandal is the philosopher Victor Cousin (1792-1867), who treated Ninon de Lenclos as a philosopher who continued the hedonistic brand of philosophy she had learned from Saint-Évremond.

The recent revival of feminism has altered the racy popular portrait of Lenclos the naughty courtesan.  Recent biographies have focused more extensively on the political sophistication, philosophical culture, and Epicurean theories of Lenclos.  Duchêne (1984) underscores the complex philosophy of love by which Lenclos justified her numerous romantic liaisons.  Debriffe (2002) presents Lenclos as a proto-feminist rebel against the submissive roles assigned to women in the genteel French society of the period.

Recent scholarship has focused on the actual writings and philosophical theories of Lenclos.  Arenberg (2005), for example, studies the neo-Epicurean theories of aging and death present in Lenclos’s correspondence with Saint-Évremond.  Lenclos’s theory of gender reciprocity and the role of her salon in the diffusion of Cartesianism and Epicureanism invite further investigation.

5. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Lenclos, Ninon de. The Coquette Avenged. 1659.
  • Lenclos, Ninon de. Lettres de Ninon de Lenclos au marquis de Sévingé, avec sa Vie, 2 vols. Paris: Lendentu, 1820.
    • An electronic version of this edition of Lenclos’s letters detailing her Epicurean philosophy of love can be found on the Gallica: Bibliothèque numérique subsection of the website of the Bibliothèque nationale de France.
  • Robinson, Charles Henry. Life, Letters, and Epicurean Philosophy of Ninon de l’Enclos. Chicago: Lion Publishing Co., 1903.
    • Despite the antiquated biography, this edition of Lenclos’s writings provides a reliable translation of her correspondence with the Marquis de Sévigné and Saint-Évremond.  An electronic version of this text is available on the website of Project Gutenberg.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Arenberg, Nancy. “Getting Old: Reflections on Aging in the Letters of Saint-Évremond and Ninon de Lenclos,” Papers on French Seventeenth-Century Literature, 2005, 32 (62), 243-56.
    • The article analyzes the Epicurean treatment of aging, illness, and death in the correspondence between Lenclos and Saint-Évremond.
  • Debriffe, Martial. Ninon de Lenclos; La belle insoumise. Paris: France-Empire, 2002.
    • This feminist interpretation of Lenclos interprets her libertinism as an act of social disobedience against the repressive mores of the period.
  • Duchêne, Roger. Ninon de Lenclos: La Courtisane du Grand Siècle. Paris: Fayard, 1984.
    • While emphasizing Lenclos’s status as courtesan, this biography details the political complexity and the intellectual sophistication of Lenclos.
  • Niderst, Alain. “Lenjouée Plotine, Madame de Maintenon, Madeleine de Scudéry et Ninon de Lenclos,” Papers on French Seventeenth-Century Literature, 2000, 27 (53), 501-08.
    • The article studies the political influence wielded by Lenclos and two contemporary salonnières.
  • Verdier, Gabrielle. “Libertine, Philanthropist, Revolutionary: Ninon’s Metamorphoses in the Age of Enlightenement,” in Libertinage and the Art of Writing, II, ed. David Rubin. New York: AMS, 1992, 101-147.
    • The article interprets Ninon’s theoretical and sexual libertinage as a forerunner of the skepticism of the lumières.


Author Information

John J. Conley
Loyola University Maryland
U. S. A.

Sarah Grimké (1792—1873) and Angelina Grimké Weld (1805—1879)

Sarah GrimkéSarah Grimké and Angelina Grimké Weld, sisters from a South Carolina slave-holding family, were active abolitionist public speakers and pioneer women’s rights advocates in a time when American women rarely occupied the public stage. Their personal stories about the horrors of slavery made them effective agents in the Northern abolitionist movement, and their subsequent marginalization in the leadership of that movement spurred them toward an articulation of women’s rights and duties in the public arena.

By necessity and conviction, both sisters connected appeals for abolition of slavery with defenses of a woman’s right to political action, understanding that they could not be effective against slavery while they did not have a public voice. They are most often referenced together in historical and philosophical texts because they lived and worked together most of their lives, jointly developing their arguments and reading each other’s works. Angelina is best known for her original work in opposition to slavery and her brilliant oratory style, while Sarah Grimké developed a radical theory of women’s rights that pre-dated and influenced the beginning of the women’s right movement in Seneca Falls. Both women connected the oppression of African Americans with the oppression of women.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
    1. Cultural and Formative Influences
    2. Public Activism: 1834-1837
    3. Continuing Influence and Later Projects
  2. Philosophical Writing
    1. Abolitionist Reasoning
    2. Women’s Rights
    3. Connecting Race Oppression to the Oppression of Women
  3. References and Further Reading

1. Biography

a. Cultural and Formative Influences

Sarah Grimké was the sixth child born to John and Mary Grimke, plantation owners and slave holders in Charleston, South Carolina. Her father was a well-known attorney who became the chief judge of the Supreme Court of South Carolina. Sarah loved learning and studied with her older brother, hoping to go on to college and practice law like her brother, but her father forbade her from continuing her studies.  At age 13, she was allowed to become the godmother of her baby sister Angelina, and was very much a part of her sister’s upbringing. In her mid-twenties, Sarah traveled with her seriously ill father to Philadelphia to be treated by a doctor, where they took up residence at a Quaker boarding house.  When the treatment failed, she alone took care of him at the New Jersey seashore for the months he was dying.

Sarah and Angelina Grimké lived in an era of religious revivalism and utopian experimentalism, both of which had an impact in various times on their lives. While returning to Charleston after her father’s death, Sarah experienced a religious conversion after reading Quaker literature and began having religious mystical experiences. In 1821, at the age of 29, disillusioned with life in Charleston, Sarah moved to Philadelphia and joined the Fourth and Arch Street Meeting of the Society of Friends. Women were welcomed into the ministry in Quaker congregations; she saw the example of Lucretia Mott in the ministry in her own meeting.  Sarah felt called to a role in the ministry, but her testimony in the meetings was never supported by the Quaker elders. Her conviction of a religious calling may be the reason she turned down a marriage proposal, and is evident in her early tendency to defend women’s rights using Christian theology iconography (Lerner 1998b, 4).

When Angelina Grimké came to realize the horrors of slavery, she first spoke out against it in the Presbyterian Church in Charleston where she had been an active member and teacher. She became frustrated with the Presbyterian minister who spoke privately with her against slavery but would not publicly denounce it. In 1827, Angelina, like her sister, had a religious conversion experience when Quaker minister Anna Braithwaite came to Charleston and stayed with the Grimké family. Following that event, she began worshipping in the tiny Charleston Quaker meeting. Instead of leaving Charleston, Angelina stayed on with a perceived mission to convert her family, if not to Quakerism, at least to abandon slavery. Six months of articulate and forceful discussion, intense prayer sessions, family upheavals and visits from friends and clergy did not change Angelina’s mind, nor did her arguments produce any resulting change among her family or friends. She was called to testify to Presbyterian Church leaders about her beliefs which resulted in expulsion from the church. In 1829 Angelina left South Carolina to join Sarah in Philadelphia, and began worshipping with the Fourth and Arch Street Meeting.

As women, Sarah and Angelina were sheltered and limited in both thought and action in their South Carolina culture, but joining the Society of Friends also limited their interaction with their contemporary world. In Philadelphia the only newspaper they read was The Friend, a Quaker weekly that passed along Quaker views on issues such as women’s rights. They could have benefited from larger feminist dialogue, such as in a sympathetic reading of the work of the Englishwoman, Frances Wright, who publicly campaigned for women’s rights in the U.S. in 1828-29. It seems more probable that the sisters would have known of African American activist Maria W. Stewart, the first American woman to speak publicly against slavery in 1831-33, whose work was published by William Lloyd Garrison.

In Philadelphia, Angelina taught classes at the school that her widowed sister Anna Frost had started in order to supplement her small income. Unhappy with her teaching experience there, Angelina considered attending and possibly teaching at the prestigious Hartford Female Seminary, a school founded and run by Catherine Beecher (whose views on women’s roles Angelina would later publicly criticize). Although she was impressed and excited by the opportunities she saw at Hartford, the Quaker elders would not give her permission to move there. Instead she settled into Philadelphia Quaker life, teaching at the infant school.

b. Public Activism: 1834-1837

In 1934, after the sudden death of the man Angelina expected to marry and the death of their respected brother, Thomas, who had been Sarah’s childhood companion, the two sisters found themselves growing more uncertain of the Quaker restrictions, and began looking for new ways to be “useful.” Angelina devoured news of the abolitionists’ struggles, including the persecution they suffered in nearly every northern city where they spoke. After reading about the struggles of the abolitionists, she wrote a moving letter to Garrison, which was published without her permission in his abolitionist journal, The Liberator. This letter catapulted Angelina into the public realm, and was followed in (1836) by her Appeal to the Christian Women of the Southern States. The Appeal was written in a personal tone, addressing Southern women as friends and colleagues. When copies of it reached the Grimké sisters’ home town of Charleston, they were publicly burned by the postmaster, and Mrs. Grimké was warned that her daughters would be prevented from ever visiting Charleston again.

In 1836, Angelina and Sarah moved to New York (against the advice and without the permission of the Philadelphia Quakers) to begin work as agents for the abolitionist cause. They were the only women to attend the 19-day intensive training during the Agents’ Convention of the American Anti-Slavery Convention in November. Within weeks of the training, they began offering public talks for female anti-slavery meetings in New York. In their talks they advocated practical ways that Northerners could influence slavery regulations, but also urged their audiences to locate and root out race prejudice in their own lives and communities. According to their analysis, race prejudice in the North and the South was a major support of the slave system. They understood this from their own experience with slaves and free blacks in the North, as well as through discussions with one of their mentors, the leading abolitionist Theodore Dwight Weld.

Following the Agents’ Convention, both Grimké sisters began their active political campaign for the abolitionist cause. They helped organize the New York Anti-Slavery Convention of American Women which strengthened their bonds with other women activists in the anti-slavery cause and in 1837 began touring Northern cities, giving talks to packed audiences. Their work was very successful and led to the creation of more female anti-slavery associations and thousands of signatures on anti-slavery petitions. However, in every city they visited, the fact that they were women speaking before a mixed (male and female) audience created an uproar, even among abolitionist sympathizers. Many religious leaders hotly rejected the idea that women should speak from pulpits and public stages. In mid-1837, as Angelina and Sarah were on their speaking tour, the Congregational Churches issued a “Pastoral Letter” warning their congregations of “the dangers which at present seem to threaten the female character with widespread and permanent injury” and called women to remember their “appropriate duties and influence … as clearly stated in the New Testament” (Lerner 1998a, 143).

Religious leaders were not the only ones who reacted against the sisters’ work. Catherine Beecher, whom Angelina had once hoped to study with, published a critique of their approach to abolition, specifically addressed to Angelina Grimké. In her essay Beecher advocated gradualism instead of immediate emancipation, and also called women to remember their subordinate role in society. Angelina responded in the summer of 1837, publishing Letters to Catherine Beecher, defending immediate emancipation of slaves, as well as the right and responsibility of women to participate as citizens in their society. During this same period, Sarah also began writing Letters on the Equality of the Sexes.

Their speaking tour ended in late 1837 with Angelina very ill and both sisters exhausted from their grueling traveling and lecturing schedule.

c. Continuing Influence and Later Projects

The debate over women’s participation began to split the anti-slavery movement. Even the New York Executive Committee, who trained the sisters for public speaking, was unwilling to give them official “agent” status, fearing that public energy would be diverted by the women’s right issue. In letters to the Grimké sisters, abolitionist leaders Theodore Weld and Quaker John Whittier asked them to concentrate only on the anti-slavery issue. Referencing their work on women’s rights, Whittier asked, “Is it not forgetting the great and dreadful wrongs of the slave in a selfish crusade against some paltry grievances of our own?” Angelina and Sarah responded that women needed to claim free speech and other rights in order to do the work they were called to do.  “What then can woman do for the slave when she is herself under the feet of man and shamed into silence?” (Lerner 1998a, 151-2)

Instead of withdrawing from the public stage, Angelina and Sarah went on to achieve even more notoriety when, in 1838, Angelina testified at a Committee of the Legislature of the State of Massachusetts, becoming the first American woman to testify in a legislative meeting. Later in 1838, at the age of 33, Angelina married abolitionist Theodore Dwight Weld, and they moved with Sarah to Fort Lee, New Jersey. Although it was both Angelina’s and Sarah’s intention to continue their public activism, the pressures of running a household and raising three children, as well as the results of increasing poverty required them to withdraw from the speaking in the public arena. They continued to write and work to support abolitionist causes. One of their first projects after the marriage was to comb through back issues of Southern newspapers to gather empirical data about slavery for Weld’s book, American Slavery As It Is (1839).  That text also contains essays written by the Grimké sisters which provide clear and horrifying details of the conditions of slavery from their own experiences.

Although the Grimké sisters were no longer public lecturers, the fervor they raised about the “woman question” continued to cause dissention in the abolitionist movement. That issue, joined with other divisions about utopian/anarchist withdrawal versus political action, caused the movement to split into two separate organizations in 1840. Unfortunately the organization which embraced political action – in some ways the natural choice for Weld and for the Grimké sisters – also excluded the participation of women. Weld and both of the sisters withdrew from active participation for a short time; when Theodore resumed his activist work in 1841, Angelina and Sarah were overwhelmed with caring for the young children and maintaining the farm.

In 1848, Weld and the two sisters established a co-educational boarding school out of their home, with Angelina teaching history and Sarah teaching French. Although friends and family sent their children there (two sons of Elizabeth Cady Stanton attended) the school was a struggle, and made very little money. In 1854 the Welds and Sarah joined the utopian community Raritan Bay Union, where Theodore Weld started the progressive and experiential Eagleswood School.  Angelina and Sarah both taught and assisted with administration. The school continued when the Union failed two years later, with Angelina and Sarah as teachers. In 1862 the family moved to Boston to continue their teaching careers.

Angelina and Sarah remained committed to women’s issues, but their ability to be physically involved in activism was limited. Their example as women who spoke publicly against slavery and for women’s rights continued to inspire other female activists. Recognizing Angelina’s impact on women’s rights, the women’s rights leaders elected her a member of the Central Committee of the 1850 woman’s rights convention even though she was unable to attend. Both women continued to participate in future women’s rights convention and in the women’s movement, however mostly through letters and other writings.  As late as 1870 they were both vice presidents of the Massachusetts Woman Suffrage Association, and symbolically cast ballots in a local election.

In 1868, Angelina and Sarah discovered that their brother Henry had fathered children by his female slave, Nancy Weston.  Those children, Archibald, John and Francis James Grimké had been sold into slavery by their half-brother. When Angelina and Sarah found out about these three young men, they established close relationships, and supported Archibald and Francis through college and graduate school. Archie studied law at Harvard, and Francis went to Princeton Theological Seminary.  Both men went on to national leadership among the Black communities. As pastor of the 15th Street Presbyterian Church in Washington D.C., Francis Grimké and his wife Charlotte Forten Grimké were friends and colleagues of Anna Julia Cooper. Archibald was a vice-president of the NAACP and president of the American Negro Academy.

Sarah Grimké died in 1873, Angelina Grimké Weld died in 1879. Catherine Birney, a former student at their boarding school, published a full biography of the sisters in 1885.

2. Philosophical Writing

a. Abolitionist Reasoning

Although their early education was limited, while growing up in a family of lawyers and judges the Grimké sisters became familiar with constitutional law based on the liberal political theory of the founders of the constitution. According to historian Gerda Lerner (1998b, 22) Sarah had read Locke, Jefferson, and other Enlightenment thinkers, and her writing consistently integrates these Enlightenment ideals with Biblical analysis. In Sarah’s first major writing, An Epistle to the Clergy of the Southern States (1836), she combines a scholarly interpretation of the Old Testament with language from Bill of Rights. It is written in the style of the apostolic letters in the New Testament, and as such seems odd to modern ears.  In this essay, Sarah’s first claim is that slavery is in opposition to Biblical teaching. She uses Genesis to support her claim that although humans can use animals as “means” – as food to sustain their existence, all people are created in God’s image and so cannot be used as mere means for others’ ends. She moves to a more Kantian understanding that making such a God-created “man” into a “thing” violates “God’s unchanging degree.” Given a philosophic understanding that immortality is dependent on rationality, she points out that every slave is a “rational and immortal being” and so has certain “inalienable rights” (Ceplair 92), reflective of her reading of Locke’s Natural Rights argument.  In her Epistle, Sarah called “every Christian minister” to “preach the word of immediate emancipation” (Ceplair 109).

In 1836, Angelina published her first work, the Appeal to the Christian Women of the South, written in the form of a letter to close friends. Her claim for the equality of slaves is also based on natural rights as well as God-given rights.  In the Lockean language of the Declaration of Independence she points out that “all men, every where and of every color are born equal and have an inalienable right to liberty” (Ceplair 38). She continues by dismantling claims that slavery is sanctioned under Hebrew law, pointing out that none of the ways that Hebrew men or women became servants in Old Testament law are applicable to the conditions of African American slavery.  Responding to slave-owners’ claims that Christ did not condemn slavery, she demonstrates how treating other humans as “chattel property” contradicts the commandment that “Whatsoever ye would that men should do to you, do ye even so to them” (Ceplair 50). While acknowledging that women do not have the right to vote, she evokes the image of Esther’s political action in the Bible, appealing directly to Southern women to gather signatures on petitions to their legislatures.  “Such appeals to your legislatures would be irresistible, for there is something in the heart of man which will bend under moral suasion” (Ceplair 66).

After reading Angelina’s Appeal to the Christian Women of the South, influential educator Catherine Beecher (1800-1878) responded by publishing an 1837 article addressed to Angelina Grimké, titled An Essay on Slavery and Abolitionism with reference to the Duty of American Females, critiquing the idea of immediate emancipation. Beecher was one of a number of Americans who agreed that slavery was wrong but argued for “gradualism.” Gradualists argued that slavery could be eradicated slowly though such measures as stopping the slave trade, freeing the children of slaves, banning slavery in new territories, or even re-colonizing slaves back to Africa. Beecher supported the re-colonization movement which raised funds to send black ex-slaves back to Africa. Responding in the Letters to Catherine Beecher, Angelina defended immediate abolition, showed the fallacies of gradualism, attacked racial prejudice, and defended women’s right and responsibility to do public activism. She reiterated the abolitionist principle “that no circumstances can ever justify a man holding his fellow man as property,” concluding that the slave owner is “bound immediately to cease holding (the slave)” (Ceplair 149-150). She also pointed out that although Northerners had outlawed slavery, they were guilty of racial prejudice, which was at the heart of gradualism and the re-colonization movement. And so, she said, “I am trying to talk down, and write down and live down this horrible prejudice … we must dig up this weed by the roots out of each of our hearts…” (Lerner 1998a, 141).  Later in 1837, responding to a public request to present “definite practicable means” by which Northerners could have affect on slavery, the Grimké sisters once again point to racial prejudice in the North as also responsible for making slavery possible. As she reiterated later, “Northern prejudice against color is grinding the colored man to the dust in our free states, and this is strengthening the hands of the oppressor continually” (“Letter to Clarkston” Ceplair 121). The Grimkés understood that slavery and race inequity “degrades the oppressor as well as the oppressed” (Weld, et al 1934, 790).

b. Women’s Rights

In order to claim the right to speak in public, Angelina and Sarah had to argue against the conventional philosophy that men and women were naturally meant to occupy “separate spheres” of existence – that woman’s role was in the private sphere, while men controlled the public sphere. As has often been the case in history, some of the most fervent opposition to women’s rights came from other women. Catherine Beecher was well-known as a pioneering advocate for women’s education, who established many schools for women including the Hartford Female Seminary. As such, she was a public person by virtue of the organizations that she created, and the leadership roles she played in society, yet she did not believe that women should have political roles. Although Beecher argued that child-raising and women’s work in the household required that women be educated, she did not support women’s suffrage or the idea of women petitioning Congress.  As she said, “Men are the proper persons to make appeals to the rulers whom they appoint… [women] are surely out of place in attempting to do it themselves” (Lerner 1998a, 140).

In Letters XI and XII of her response to Beecher, Angelina logically dismantles the separate spheres mentality as prescribed by Rousseau and claimed instead that as moral beings the spheres of woman and man are the same. She explicitly connects abolitionist work to women’s rights, noting that her “investigation into the rights of the slave has led me to a better understanding of my own.”  The natural corollary of her abolitionist argument that as slaves, “human beings have rights because they are moral beings” is that women too have human rights that are not dependent on their sex. Hence, “whatever is morally right for a man to do, it is morally right for a woman to do” (Ceplair 194-5).  Angelina ends these two letters with the recommendation that the reader refer to Sarah Grimké’s writing on the subject of women’s rights.

Immersed as they were in Christian culture and traditions, the Grimké sisters faced Bible-based opposition to the idea of women’s equality.  Given their religious training, they replied to their critics with careful Biblical reasoning in defense of women’s rights, against what they said was the common “perverted interpretation” of the Bible. In the first chapter of Sarah’s Letters on the Equality of the Sexes and the Condition of Women (Ceplair 104) she begins with the two creation stories in Genesis to claim women’s equality. First, she points out that women as well as men were created in God’s image, in “perfect equality.” In the second creation story, Eve is formed out a rib of Adam, to be a helpmeet, “in all respects his equal,” as she reasons that a companion created by God would necessarily be his equal. Her religious critics would then point to the story of the fall, and Eve’s role in that. Sarah points out that Eve succumbed to supernatural evil, while Adam succumbed to merely mortal temptation, and thus men could not claim moral superiority over women.  She claims that the phrase “Thou wilt be subject unto thy husband, and he will rule over thee” is a mistranslation.  The Hebrew, she claimed, “uses the same word to express shall and will.” Thus, the phrase should in fact be translated as a prophecy, not a command, in the same way that the “immediate struggle for dominion” among humans is a prophecy, not a command.  She concludes that there is no reason to conclude from the Genesis story that original sin created a necessary condition of inequality between men and women. Then, as God has not caused a condition of inequality between men and women, she asks in the next letter that her brethren “take their feet from off our necks allowing us to stand upright” (Ceplair 208).

Angelina and Sarah continued throughout their work to claim their rights as citizens of the republic, whose “honor, happiness and well-being are bound up in its politics, government and law” (Lerner 1998a, 8). This claim was echoed 10 years later in 1848 in the Declaration of Sentiments presented at Seneca Falls Convention for women’s rights.  Throughout Sarah’s and Angelina’s writing, their arguments for women’s rights is based on the moral authority of the reasoning person – similar to the arguments that they both made for natural rights for African Americans. In this they may also be reflecting some of the arguments that they had read in Mary Wollstonecraft’s 1792 Vindication of the Rights of Women.

c. Connecting Race Oppression to the Oppression of Women

The Grimké sisters were among the first to explicitly connect race oppression to women’s oppression. Sarah “thanked” John Quincy Adams in her Letters on Equality for placing women “side by side with the slave” “ranking us with the oppressed.” Using a Kantian ethical argument that opposes using humans as means rather than as ends in themselves, she noted that historically “woman has … been made a means to promote the welfare of man” (Ceplair 209).  She tied the subordination of slaves and women to educational deprivation, noting that both women and slaves been deemed mentally inferior “while being denied the privileges of liberal education” (Lerner 1998a, 122-3).  In 1863 after Lincoln’s Emancipation Proclamation, Angelina said that as women, “True, we have not felt the slaveholder’s lash; true we have not had our hands manacled, but our hearts have been crushed … I want to be identified with the negro; until he gets his rights, we shall never have ours” (Lerner 1998a, 263).  Throughout their lives the sisters also stressed their bonds of sisterhood with African American women, in both their writing and in their close friendships with African American women.

Sarah’s claim that sexual oppression was a major cause of the subordination of women was far ahead of her contemporaries.  Writing in the late 1850s Sarah used the language of bondage to speak of women’s roles. “She is your slave, the victim of your passions, the sharer willingly and unwillingly of your licentiousness” (Lerner 1998b, 81). She examined marital rape in her essay “Marriage” in an era when it would have been shocking for a woman to discuss such things. She identifies women as in a position of slavery for being unable to refuse sex to her husband. Instead of having loving sexual relations, women would often “rise in the morning oppressed with a sense of degradation from the fact that their chastity has been violated…” discovering that she is a “legal prostitute … a mere convenience” (Lerner 1998b, 113-114). She called for the right of education for women, full human rights, financial independence and a woman’s right to decide when and if she would become a mother.  In other essays she identified men, individually and as a group, as having benefited from women’s oppression in the same way that plantation owners benefited from race oppression.

When John Stuart Mill’s The Subjection of Women came out in 1869, Sarah at age 77 walked throughout her neighborhood selling 150 copies of the book to her neighbors (Lerner 40). It’s no wonder that Mill’s book appealed to Sarah – it contains arguments for equal rights for women that are very similar to those developed by the Grimké sisters. 

3. References and Further Reading

  • Bartlett, Elizabeth Ann (ed.) 1988. Sarah Grimké, Letters on the Equality of the Sexes and other Essays. New Haven: Yale University Press.
    • In this collection of the writings of Sarah Grimké Bartlett argues that Sarah’s Letters is the first philosophical work on the condition of women in America.
  • Birney, Catherine. 1885. The Grimké Sisters: Sarah and Angelina Grimké: the First Women Advocates of Abolition and Women’s Rights. Boston: Lee and Sheppard.
    • The earliest biography of the Grimké sisters written by the daughter of a family friend. The full text is available in e-format from several online publishers.
  • Ceplair, Larry, (ed). 1989. The Public Years of Sarah and Angelina Grimké: Selected Writings 1836-1839. New York: Columbia University Press.
    • This valuable text contains the major works of the Grimké sisters (some of them excerpted) with short introductions by the editor.
  • Grimké, Angelina. 2003. Walking by Faith: The Diary of Angelina Grimke, 1828-1835. Ed. Charles Wilbanks. University of South Carolina Press.
  • Lerner, Gerda. 1998a. The Grimké Sisters from South Carolina: Pioneers for Women’s Rights and Abolition. New York: Oxford University Press.
    • Reprint of Lerner’s 1967 biography with a new introduction; this is the most complete intellectual biography of the Grimké sisters.
  • Lerner, Gerda. 1998b. The Feminist Thought of Sarah Grimké. New York: Oxford University Press. This companion book to Lerner’s full biography contains a short biographical introduction to Sarah Grimké’s life, as well as reprints of Sarah’s letters and essays.
  • Lumpkin, Katharine Du Pre. 1974. The Emancipation of Angelina Grimké. Chapel Hill: University of North Carolina Press.
    • Biography of Angelina Grimké that explores the forces behind Angelina’s break with the Southern Christian culture of her youth.
  • Weld, Theodore Dwight, ed. 1839. American Slavery As It Is: Testimony of a Thousand Witnesses. New York: American Anti-Slavery Society.
  • Weld, Theodore Dwight, ed. 1934. Angelina Grimké Weld, and Sarah Grimké. Letters of Theodore Dwight Weld, Angelina Grimké Weld and Sarah Grimké: 1822-1844. 2 vols. Gilbert H. Barnes and Dwight L. Dumond, eds.  New York: D. Appleton-Century Company, Inc.


Author Information

Judy Whipps
Grand Valley State University
U. S. A.

Friedrich Wilhelm Joseph von Schelling (1775—1854)


Schelling F. W. J. von Schelling is one of the great German philosophers of the late 18th and early 19th Century. Some historians and scholars of philosophy have classified him as a German Idealist, along with J. G. Fichte and G. W. F. Hegel. Such classifications obscure rather than illuminate the importance and singularity of Schelling’s place in the history of philosophy. This is because the dominant and most often limited understanding of Idealism as systematic metaphysics of the Subject is applicable more to Hegel’s philosophy than Schelling's. While initiating the Post-Kantian Idealism of the Subject, Schelling went on to exhibit in his later works the limit and dissolution of such a systemic metaphysics of the Subject. Therefore, the convenient label of Schelling as one German Idealist amongst others ignores the singularity of Schelling’s philosophy and the complex relationship he had with the movement of German Idealism.

The real importance of Schelling’s later works lies in the exposure of the dominant systemic metaphysics of the Subject to its limit rather than in its confirmation. In this way, the later works of Schelling demand from the students and philosophers of German Idealism a re-assessment of the notion of German Idealism itself. In that sense, the importance and influence of Schelling’s philosophy has remained “untimely.” In the wake of Hegelian rational philosophy that was the official philosophy of that time, Schelling’s later works was not influential and fell onto deaf ears. Only in the twentieth century when the question of the legitimacy of the philosophical project of modernity had come to be the concern for philosophers and thinkers, did Schelling’s radical opening of philosophy to “post-metaphysical” thinking receive renewed attention.

This is because it is perceived that the task of philosophical thinking is no longer the foundational act of the systematic metaphysics of the Subject. In the wake of “end of philosophy,” the philosophical task is understood to be the inauguration of new thinking beyond metaphysics. In this context, Schelling has again come into prominence as someone who in the heyday of German Idealism has opened up the possibility of a philosophical thinking beyond the closure of the metaphysics of the Subject. The importance of Schelling for such post-metaphysical thinking is rightly emphasized by Martin Heidegger in his lecture on Schelling of 1936. In this manner Heidegger prepares the possibility of understanding Schelling’s works in an entirely different manner. Heidegger’s reading of Schelling in turn has immensely influenced the Post-Heideggerian French philosophical turn to the question of “the exit from metaphysics”. But this Post-Structuralist and deconstructive reading of Schelling is not the only reception of Schelling. Philosophers like Jürgen Habermas, whose doctorate work was on Schelling, would like to insist on the continuation of the philosophical project of modernity, and yet attempt to view reason beyond the instrumental functionality of reason at the service of domination and coercion. Schelling is seen from this perspective as a “post-metaphysical” thinker who has widened the concept of reason beyond its self-grounding projection. During the last half of the last century, Schelling’s works have tremendously influenced the post-Subject oriented philosophical discourses. During recent times, Schelling scholarship has remarkably increased both in the Anglo-American context and the Continental philosophical context.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Philosophy
    1. Naturphilosophie and Transcendental Philosophy
    2. Identity Philosophy
    3. The Middle period
    4. Positive Philosophy
  3. Influences
  4. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Life


Friedrich Wilhelm Joseph Schelling was born on 27 January, 1775 in Leonberg, Germany. His father was Joseph Friedrich Schelling and mother was Gottliebin Maria Cless. In 1785 Schelling attended the Latin School in Nürtingen. A precocious child, his teachers soon found nothing more to teach him. In 1790, Schelling joined the Tübingenstift, a Protestant Seminary, in Tübingen where he befriended Hölderlin who was later to become a great German poet, and Hegel who was to become a great philosopher. In 1794 Schelling published Über die Möglichkeit einer Form der Philosophie Überhaupt, in the same year of the publication of Fichte’s  Wissenshaftlehre. Fichte’s Wissenshaftlehre, along with Kant’s Critique of Judgment that was published four years before (1790), proved to be of decisive importance for Schelling’s early philosophical career. In 1798 at the age of just 23, Schelling was called to a professorship at the University of Jena where he came in contact with German Romantic poets and philosophers like the Schlegel brothers and Novalis. He also met August Wilhelm Schlegel’s wife Caroline Schlegel and there begun one of the most fascinating and scandalous romantic stories of that time, leading to Caroline’s divorce and her marriage to Schelling in 1803. In 1803 he left Jena for Würzburg where he was called to a professorship. In the Autumn of 1805 Würzburg fell to Austria. The following year Schelling left for Munich where he was to stay till 1841 apart from a break between 1820-1827 when he lived in Erlangen. In 1809 Schelling published his great treatise on human freedom, Philosophical Inquiries Concerning the Nature of Human Freedom. A few months later Caroline died.. Schelling was devastated. In 1812 Schelling married Pauline who was to remain his life long companion. In 1831 Hegel died. In 1840 Schelling was called upon to the now vacant chair in Berlin to replace Hegel where he sought to elaborate his Positivphilosophie which was attended by the likes of Søren Kierkegaard, Alexander Humboldt, Bakunin and Engels. In 1854 on 20 August Schelling died at the age of 79 in Bad Ragaz, Switzerland.

2. Philosophy


Encounter with the works of Schelling often baffles the scholars and historians of philosophy. Schelling’s works seem to exhibit the lack of consistent development or systematic completion which most of his contemporaries possess. As a result scholars and historians of philosophy complain of the absence of a “single” Schelling. Recent scholarship, however, while accepting the often disruptive and discontinuous movement with which Schelling’s thinking moves that defies and un-works the completion of a single definite philosophical system, finds issues that are singular to Schelling’s continuous attention and unceasing concern. Thus the absence of a systematic completion is what has become the source of fascination for recent Schelling scholarship. Schelling appears to be the mark that delineates the limit of the systematic task of philosophy, “the end of philosophy and the task of thinking” as Heidegger says. Prominent Schelling scholars like Manfred Frank and Andrew Bowie (1993) have, however, pointed out that Schelling had never abandoned the idea of ‘system’, although the idea of ‘system’ was no longer grounded on a restricted, narcissistic concept of reason as totalizing and self-grounding but as opening to that which cannot be thought in the concept.

For the sake of convenience we can roughly divide the philosophical career of Schelling into four stages:

a. Naturphilosophie and Transcendental Philosophy

b. Identity philosophy

c. The Middle period: Freedom essay and The Ages of the World

d. Positive Philosophy (Philosophy of Mythology and Philosophy of Revelation)

a. Naturphilosophie and Transcendental Philosophy

The significance of Schelling’s early philosophical works lies in its radically new understanding of nature that departs significantly from the then dominant philosophical and scientific understanding of nature. Perhaps the best the way to approach the Schelling of Naturphilosophie is to see him, on the one hand, in relation to the dominant mechanistic determination of nature at that time, that of the Newtonian mathematical determination of nature according to which nature follows certain determinable physical laws of motion and rest, and that can be grasped in the objective cognition that has universal and non-relative validity and on the other hand, as a development of post-Kantian philosophy that led to a radical revision of Kant himself. Schelling’s philosophy of nature thus arose out of the demand to respond to the mechanistic determination of nature that was dominant at that time on the one hand, and to respond to the problems that arose in Kant’s division of the phenomenal realm of nature and noumenal realm of freedom. This demanded a dynamic philosophical account of nature where nature is no longer seen as a totality of objects that are a mere inert, opaque mass, but nature that is subjected to universal laws of causality. Such a dynamic philosophy of nature must be able to resolve the abyss that is opened up in the wake of Kant’s Critique of Pure Reason. It is the abyss between the deterministic, causal, conditioned realm of understanding on the one hand, and the unconditioned realm of ethical self-determination on the other hand, between theoretical philosophy and practical philosophy. The task that the Post-Kantian philosophy has given to itself is to bridge this gap between the conceptual, constitutive realm of nature which can be grasped by causal laws that has universal validity, and the ethical spontaneity of the practical reason where the ethical subject is beyond the conditioned realm of determination and is thus a free Subject of self-determination. This Subject is the Subject of freedom that cannot be grounded in the constitutive principles of understanding but in the regulative Ideas of reason. J. G Fichte sought to unify the theoretical reason (that is “understanding”) and the practical reason by  grounding them both in the dynamic activity of the self-consciousness that posits itself as pure, unconditioned act of self-positing ‘I’. The task of accounting for the process of emergence of the world of nature, which is thus a dynamic process, is addressed by Fichte thus: nature is an essential self-limitation of the ‘I’. The unconditioned, infinite self-positing ‘I’, in order to know itself as itself, divides itself into the finite ‘I’ and its counter-movement “Not-I”. In this manner, Fichte claimed to have resolved the problem that appeared to him and to the post-Kantian philosophers as that which is left unresolved by Kant himself. This is the question of how to account for the mysterious X, “the thing-in-itself” which, according to Kant, can never be grounded in the constitutive principle of understanding. As the condition of possibility of knowledge, “the thing-in-itself” can never be known. It is irreducible to the concepts of understanding. Fichte in his Science of Knowledge accounts for the genesis of this “thing-in-itself” in the pure self-positing act of the ‘I’. Since the ‘I’ cannot be an object of outer sense like any other objects of cognition ( Kant prohibits this), ‘I’ can only emerge in a pure, primordial act of inner-self. This self-emerging ‘I’ cannot therefore be an object of conceptual cognition, of an empirical intuition. It can only be grasped in the inner sense in ‘intellectual intuition’ which is none but ‘the fact of self-consciousness.’ According to Fichte, ‘the thing-in-itself’ is this self-emerging self-consciousness which is a ‘fact’ unlike any other ‘fact’. It is a fact that only ‘intellectual intuition’ grasps in the act of pure self-intuition. This is because only a being capable of intuiting itself as simultaneously representing and represented can account for the unity of representation and object. For such a being, that is ‘I’, there is no other predicate than itself. It is its own object. This object for it appears as nature which is the self-limitation of the self-positing Subject. Fichte’s idealism later came to be known as Subjective Idealism.

Schelling’s early works flourished under the influence of Fichte’s thinking. In 1797 Schelling published an essay called Treatise Explicatory of the Idealism in the “Science of Knowledge” in Philosophisches Journal edited by Immanuel Niethammer. This essay is crucial document for understanding the transition from Kantian critical philosophy to German Idealism. While attempting to elucidate what Kant would have intended if Kant’s philosophy is to prove internally cohesive, Schelling moves to the task of unifying theoretical and practical philosophy in a single principle in such a manner that he actually moves beyond both Kantian and Fichtean philosophy. What allows this unification of theoretical and practical philosophy is the Spirit’s infinite striving to represent the universe. The Spirit is not a static entity given, something mysterious X, but infinite becoming and infinite productivity. It is in this ceaseless production lies the organic nature of human Spirit that is moved by its immanent laws and that has its purposive-ness within itself. Schelling here introduces the notion of organism which unites in its immanence its goal and purpose, its form and matter, concept and intuition. As such each organism is a system which is “an arabesque delineation of the soul” or “eternal archetype” that finds expression in every plant. As immanent unity of form and matter that orients itself towards absolute purposive-ness through successive stages, this organism is not thus mere static, lifeless entity but is said to exhibit life. The Idealist notion of the system here takes this unified world of organism as model. Intuition is the unity of form and matter, representation and object which is distinguishable only in the concept that freely repeats the originary unity. With the help of the schematic power of the imagination, concept here produces the individual object of cognition. The succession of representation occurs alternately in a circle. To move beyond this circle of theoretical knowledge, this circle where the object always returns, it is necessary to introduce an act of free self-determination which cannot be further determined. This act is the absolute act of free will which is primordial and infinite. It is with this act the theoretical and practical philosophy is united.

In the same year Schelling published his  Naturphilosophie that further elaborates the concept of organism through analysis of natural phenomena with the help of scientific studies of the day. This work responds to the dual tasks mentioned above. On the one hand it must give an account of a dynamic process of the emergence of nature as against the mechanistic, deterministic understanding of nature; and on the other hand, to resolve the problem left by Kant, that of bridging the realm of theoretical and practical philosophy by developing a dynamic philosophy of nature that takes into account Fichtean dialectical philosophy of consciousness. Like the Treatise of the same year, this new philosophy of nature is not grounded in the self-positing, unconditioned self-consciousness but by positing a “non-objective”, unconditioned in nature itself which Schelling calls “productivity”. It is this productivity that emerges through the logic of polar oppositions between subject and object that is shown to lead to a higher subject-object synthesis. For Schelling such a dialectical logic is deducted as a movement of potencies. The first potency is the movement of infinite to the finite. The second potency makes the reverse movement, while the third potency alone, which is higher than the other two, unities preceding potencies. In this manner Schelling explains magnetism as the first potency, electricity as the second and chemistry as the third potency that dialectically sublates the other two. Schelling’s philosophy of nature that attempts to develop the dynamic process of Idealism from the objective side can be seen as a parallel development to the Subjective Idealism that is elaborated by Fichte.

In the Treatise Explicatory of the Idealism in the “Science of Knowledge” of 1797 Schelling hints at the idea of “the history of self-consciousness”. The Spirit through its originary activity presents the infinite in the finite, a movement whose goal is self-consciousness that marks the unification of theoretical and practical philosophy, nature and history. Schelling perfects this model in his System of Transcendenatl Idealism.   Schelling’s publication of The System of Transcendental Idealism in 1800 brought immediate fame to the young 25 year old philosopher. Schelling here draws from Fichte’s great insight that self-consciousness is not a mere “given entity”. It is not an unknown and inaccessible X,  a mysterious transcendental “in-itself” as the formal ground of cognition, but a coming into presence of itself, a pure self-positing emergence through the dialectical process of self-positing and self-limitation. In that way a “history of self-consciousness” can be deduced from one principle that explains the coming into being of the theoretical cognition that at its limit passes into the practical realm of freedom, that is, the objective world of history . This is the task of Schelling’s System of Transcendental Idealism of 1800. Thus the axiomatic sense of Fichtean I=I is transformed into the dynamic deduction of the self-consciousness by one principle. This is emergence of the Idealist notion of System whose possibility, according to the Idealists, is already given in Kantian Critical philosophy; a possibility is denied by Kant himself.

“The history of self-consciousness” comes into being in three stages or epochs. While the first epoch manifests the coming into being of “productive intuition” from “original sensation” and the second epoch manifests the emergence of “reflection” from “productive intuition”, the third epoch recounts the emergence of “the absolute act of will” from “reflection”. At the end of the third epoch, “the history of self-consciousness” passes into the practical realm where the deduction of the concept of history is shown to be the realm of unity of freedom and necessity. This has led Schelling to ask at the end of System: how the Subject which is now a completed self-consciousness can become conscious of that moment of its origin which is now unconscious for it, a past that appears to have receded into an immemorial origin and is inaccessible? It now appears that the condition of possibility of consciousness as such remains irreducible to consciousness itself. This is the problem that has become decisive, not only for Schelling’s subsequent philosophical career, but for the fate of Idealism as such. It now appears as if our self-consciousness is driven or constituted by an unconscious ground, forever inaccessible to consciousness, which can never be grounded in consciousness itself.

For Schelling this shows the limit of philosophical cognition and at the same time the importance of works of art. By refusing the claim to say or represent the synthesis of unconscious and conscious, the work of art rather shows it. Therefore art can be said to be the “the eternal organ and document of philosophy” whose basic character is an “unconscious infinity” that arises in the work of art’s synthesis of nature and freedom. While the artist initiates a work of art with a manifest, conscious intention, she, in an unconscious and unintentional manner, depicts infinity without representing or saying it. Such an unintentional showing exceeds the representational acts of consciousness. It cannot be reduced to categorical statements. Therefore works of art cannot be understood on the basis of pre-given set of rules. Works of art are not exhausted in the normative or axiomatic definitions as to ‘what constitutes art as such’. What constitutes the ‘essence’ of art lies rather in its excess of showing over the said. In that sense works of art are more analogous with organisms by virtue of its existing as a link between unconsciousness and consciousness. Such a link can only be shown and therefore remains irreducible to the propositional character of judgment. Schelling develops such insights further in his lectures on The Philosophy of Art (1802), two years after The System of Transcendental Idealism . Unlike Hegel’s lectures on Aesthetics where Hegel argues that “the work of art is a thing of the past” in so far as it no longer has an essential relation to the Absolute even though works of art will continue to be produced, and thus pass into the sobriety of philosophy’s Absolute Knowledge, Schelling sees works of art and philosophy as manifesting the differential mode of the Absolute where art retains an essential, singular and irreducible role.

b. Identity Philosophy

In 1795,  Friedrich Hölderlin published an article called On Judgment and Being that has proved to be of decisive importance for the later development of German Idealism. In this small article Hölderlin attempts to think of an Absolute identity, a prior and originary ground of consciousness that cannot be grasped or known within the immanence of self-consciousness. Hölderlin calls this originary identity “being”( Seyn) which he distinguishes from Judgment ( das Urteil). Hölderlin here attempts to think of an originary identity that grounds the reflective judgment. According to Hölderlin this reflective judgment which is the unity of a disjunction, separation or difference between the subject and the object, must already presuppose an originary identity before judgment. In so far as judgment presupposes the difference between the subject and the object of consciousness, it must already be grounded in an identity. This identity is being (Seyn) which, because of its ground character, remains irreducible to the reflective consciousness. In order for judgment to be possible, it must be grounded in a principle that exceeds judgment itself. This originary identity is being which is before or without consciousness.

In his Identity philosophy, Schelling too attempts to move beyond the immanence of self-consciousness and the circle of reflective judgment. With this move, Schelling decisively breaks away from the Fichtean subjective Idealism. The question of ‘I’ is no longer the point of departure, unlike that of Fichte’s absolute ‘I’ that is not an inert substance but arises purely in the act of self-positing. Rather, here it is the question of consciousness as a result of a process which is to be grasped not merely from the side of the Subject of self-consciousness but from the other side as well. This relation between subject and object thus can no longer be grounded within self-consciousness itself but in an absolute indifference that is prior to this distinction and hence, that can only be presupposed but is never accessible to reflective judgment or to the categories of understanding. Unlike that of reflective philosophy, the question is no longer that of making a correspondence between the subject and the object of consciousness. Such a representational philosophy of correspondence is here abandoned. The problem is rather that of explaining the manifestation of a finite world from a ground that is forever excluded from the infinite chain of conditioned, finite, particular entities. In order not to fall into dualism, which Jacobi alludes is the dualism between the unconditioned ground on the one hand and the infinite chain of conditioned, finite entities on the other, Schelling has to explain the manifestation of the finite world out of its unconditioned ground, from an absolute indifference, without falling into the logic of reflective thinking which Hegel later uses to develop in his Phenomenology of Spirit. This is the emergence of the finite world of entities that are connected to each other in an infinite chain of predicates from an originary indifference which is unconditioned. This emergence is not a smooth transition but a qualitative leap, a diversion, a falling away (Abfall) from its originary ground. Later in his critique of Hegel, Schelling argues that such a leap cannot be understood on the basis of Hegelian modality of dialectical negativity that arrives at absolute knowledge only on the basis of the self-cancellation of the finite.

Perhaps the most lucid and systematic exposition of Schelling Identity philosophy will be found in his posthumously published lecture called The System of Philosophy in General and of the Philosophy of Nature in Particular (1804). Schelling gave this lecture during his brief years of stay at Würzburg. Schelling here begins with the proposition which according to him is the first presupposition of all knowledge, that is: “the knower and that which is known are the same”. This proposition immediately puts into question the correspondence theory of truth and knowledge that was dominant at that time. The correspondence theory of knowledge posits two principles – the subject and the object of knowledge – which are then sought to be reconciled in a higher synthetic principle. According to Schelling, once this dualism is posited, the possibility of knowledge itself becomes inexplicable. Therefore Schelling begins with an absolute identity of the known and the knower, an identity that cannot be posited within subjectivity. With this notion of absolute identity beyond subjectivity, Schelling definitely breaks with Fichte’s Subjective Idealism and Kant’s reflective philosophy. Distinguishing his Identitätssystem from both Empiricism and merely subjective Idealism, Schelling here introduces the notion of the Absolute that has proved to be of crucial importance for German Idealism in general. The absolute identity is the unconditional identity of the subject and the object, idea and Being, Ideal and Real both at once, immediately posited and not discreetly. As immediate knowledge of the absolute, this system of identity is distinguished from what Schelling calls “common sense understanding”.

The common sense understanding distinguishes conditional knowledge, which is synthetic, real knowledge from unconditional knowledge, which is analytic and thus is no real knowledge. Here common sense understanding comes to an irresolvable aporia: either I have real, objective knowledge, but then I renounce the unconditional; or, I have the unconditional in which case it is merely subjective and thus is no real knowledge. According to Schelling, this irresolvable aporia is the aporia of Kantian philosophy  which Kantian dogmatism can never resolve. This demands a move beyond Kant’s critical philosophy. This move which inaugurates German Idealism consists of going beyond the mediated knowledge of the Absolute to the immediate knowledge of the Absolute which is an immediate affirmation of this affirmation. As immediate knowledge of the absolute, Reason is Absolute Knowledge. From this idea Hegel’s notion of the Absolute is not far.  Unlike Kant’s regulative idea of Reason, Reason here is the idea of God as an immediate, absolute, unconditional identity. The immediate awareness of the Spirit of its absolute will which can never be further grounded in concept, is what Schelling calls in this essay ‘intellectual intuition’. It is intuition because it is not yet mediated by concept, and it is intellectual because it goes beyond the empirical in that it has as its predicate its self-affirmation. As the unconditional ground of all knowledge, ‘intellectual intuition’ does not belong even to inner sense. Thus what Fichte calls ‘intellectual intuition’ is no longer seen here as belonging to the inner sense but to the unconditional absolute which is beyond the circle of self-consciousness. “The fact of consciousness” is not originary, for there must already be a priori identity before differences come to manifest in consciousness. The essence of Reason can be said to be ‘intellectual intuition’ whose object is exclusively the absolute which is monolithic, one and only substance. By virtue of this affirmation, Reason recognizes “the eternal impossibility of non-being”. Being is not a predicate of God as something lying outside or exterior, but God and being is immediately, unconditionally one without duration. This absolute identity is infinite by virtue of its idea. Therefore God can neither be thought as the end result of the self-negation of difference, nor being involved in a process of emanation. The indivisibility and univocity of God is neither a numerical concept nor a concept of totality as aggregate unity of finite particulars. This is because the indivisibility and univocity of God is the ground for infinite divisibility in form or in accidents. How can the existence of finite, particulars be explained within Identitätssystem?

In regard to the absolute identity, these finite, particulars are surely non-being, non-ens, non-essentials that can neither subtract nor add anything to the essence of the being who is the absolute substance. The existence of the finite, particulars can only be understood, not as modification of essence, but as modifications in form. They are non-being in respect to the universal which is absolute identity, but considered independently, they are not completely devoid of being. They are in part being and in part non-being. As such they are “real” or “concrete” things, irreducibly finite, particular, multiple, whose ground of existence does not lie within themselves but in that absolute identity of Being and essence. Schelling here deduces the finitude of particulars which ‘common sense understanding’ calls ‘actuality’, not as a process of emanation from the absolute identity, but as negativity that adheres in all finite things. Since these finite things cannot have positivity of being within themselves, they must therefore always relate themselves to other finite things, all sensuous cognition of them can only be non-cognition. Schelling here radically departs from Kant. For Kant all cognition is cognition of the sensible but not of the supersensible. By contrast Schelling argues that all of our sensory knowledge is only a privation of knowledge, or rather, “a negation of knowledge”. Hegel argues in a similar manner in Phenomenology of Spirit (1807) where he shows in a dialectical manner, the vanity of the supposed certitude of sensuous cognition.

One can present the schema of Schelling’s Identitätssystem as follows. God as absolute identity is an essential, qualitative identity. Absolute indifference follows from this essential identity of the absolute. Therefore, absolute indifference is not in-itself essential but a quantitative identity. There is thus a difference between absolute identity and absolute indifference. The opposition between real and ideal, subject and object arises out of this indifference. This is the birth of the finite world. Schelling here introduces the theory of potencies in triplicates that are “the necessary modes of appearances of the real and ideal universes”. While the potencies in triplicates are “the necessary modes of appearances” of the finite universes, they are not applicable to the absolute identity. The absolute identity is thus without potency or devoid of power. The potencies are those modes of appearances that make manifest the non-essential. Therefore they all have equal dignity in relation to the absolute. No potency has priority over the others temporally, for they are not posited successively in a genetic sequence but simultaneously, with equal primordiality. As such, they constitute a circle where all the potencies are posited together but not in an equal manner. Each time the potencies are posited, a particular potency predominates, subjugating the others to their relative non-being. At another time another potency predominates in an alternate manner, always returning to the same and always going away, always being attracted and repulsed, always contracted and expanded in an alternate, circular manner. In this alternating,  rotatory movement of potencies the Real principle comes first as the ground or condition of the Ideal Universe. The Ideal universe then overcomes the Real principle, its conditioning and grounding factor, by relegating it to its relative non-being. Only the higher synthetic principle can unify both the Real and Ideal universes by inhering in both and yet separating each from the other. Schelling presents the theory of potency in the following formula:



A2 =  (A=B)


A=B  :   The domination of the Real or affirmed. It is A1

A2     :    The domination of the Ideal

A3     :    Indifference between the other two

With the theory of potencies Schelling explains the existence of the finite universes which are originally one. Their existence is neither completely being nor nothing, but a relative being and relative non-being. As relative being and relative non-being, potencies exceed each time from the immanence of self-presence. They never arrive at the absolute equilibrium of forces without ceasing themselves to be potencies. The circle of the potencies never comes to standstill, or that they do not come out of the circle unless a will superior to this circle of the conditioned existence breaks in.

Three years after this lecture, Hegel published his magnum opus Phenomenology of Spirit. In his Phenomenology of Spirit published in 1807, Hegel apparently criticizes Schelling’s notion of the Absolute indifference as “the night where all cows are black”. In a letter to Hegel, Schelling asks Hegel to clarify in the Preface to the Phenomenology whether this criticism is applied to him or to others who misuse Schelling’s ideas. Hegel did not incorporate this clarification in the subsequent edition of Phenomenology that the criticism is applied, not to Schelling, but to others. This led to the break in the friendship between the two philosophers who shared the same room at Tübingenstift. While this friendship was profoundly important and fruitful for both of them, the bitterness proved to be equally decisive for the development of  their singular modes of thinking, one leading to the task of systematic completion of the metaphysics of the Subject, the other leading to the attempt to inaugurate a new thinking beyond such a metaphysics of the Subject.

c. The Middle period


Published in 1809, Philosophical Inquiries into the Nature of Human Freedom is perhaps the most important book that Schelling published in his life time. Along with Hegel’s Phenomenology of Spirit, Fichte’s Science of Knowledge, and Kant’s Critique of Judgment, this essay is one of the greatest philosophical achievements of the late 18th and 19th century Germany. Published immediately before the death of Caroline, it evokes “a deep, unappeasable melancholy” that adheres to all finite beings. Here Schelling does not pose the question concerning the essence of human freedom as the dialectical problem between nature and freedom. Freedom does not appear here as the free exercise of the rational Subject’s will to mastery over its sensuous nature, but as the capacity to do evil. The question thus posed is no longer one question amongst others but the metaphysical question concerning the possibility of a system of freedom. On the one hand, freedom appears to be that which cannot be included within a system at all; on the other hand, the demand of Idealism that there must be a system without which nothing is adequately comprehensible is not to be renounced. The essay attempts to reconcile these two incommensurable demands: the demand of the unconditionality of freedom that grounds being and the demand of the grounding act of the system. This attempt at the system of freedom arose in the wake of what came to be known as the “pantheism controversy”.

The pantheism controversy is centred on the supposedly atheistic figure of Spinoza. During the late 18th century, and early 19th century, the dominant understanding of Spinoza was that of a pantheist and consequently an atheist. It is understood that within the pantheistic system of Spinoza’s ethics wherein God is immediately identified with the world, there is no place for the affirmation of God as unconditional reality. If the world is only a totality of conditioned, finite beings, then the unconditioned existence of God cannot be understood to be immediately identifiable with the world, and consequently with any dogmatic, rational system.  In the famous pantheism controversy, Friedrich Heinrich Jacobi attempted to show that a system of rational knowledge never arrives at the unconditioned since, for such a system, the unconditioned can only arise as a result of a process where the one conditioned leads to other conditioned in an infinite chain of negativity. To be properly concerned with the unconditioned, one must begin with the unconditioned itself  which no rational knowledge ever attains. For Jacobi it is only the leap of faith beyond the system of rational knowledge that enables us to open to the unconditionality of the absolute being. Therefore all system of rational knowledge for Jacobi is nihilism. Jacobi thereby becomes the first to use the word “nihilism” that arose in the context of the pantheism controversy.

Schelling here agrees with Jacobi about the limit of purely rational attainment of the unconditioned. Schelling, however, disagrees with Jacobi’s use of a limited and restricted notion of ‘system’ and ‘freedom’, along with Jacobi’s restricted use of the metaphysical and logical notion of judgment. In the Freedom essay Schelling attempts to re-interpret the logical and metaphysical notion of judgment in such a manner that it opens up to the unconditioned character of freedom without renouncing the demand of a system. Such a system must, on the one hand, be other than a purely formal, lifeless realism of Spinoza; and on the other hand, it must be otherwise than a conventional system of idealism that reduces the dynamic character of freedom and the world into pure rational necessity. Only a dynamic notion of the system that affirms the exuberance of life and the generosity of freedom can truly be system. The formal, rational notion of freedom as the intelligible principle that overcomes sensuous impulses must be opened to the ontological question of the beings in their becoming. The question of judgment is thus no longer merely a formal logical question but the question of the jointure, or bond of beings. This bond or jointure of beings is grounded in freedom which, understood in more originary manner, is not arbitrary free will but that belongs together with highest necessity. This jointure of beings – the infinite, creative being of God and the finite, created being called ‘man’ – must be  essentially a free relation, a relation that is governed by freedom which in the highest sense is also necessity. If man is free in a certain manner, then this manner is also the manner of man’s individuation. This is to say that to the extent that man is individuated by freedom, man’s freedom is distinguishable from the absolute freedom of the infinite, eternal being called God. This peculiar essence of human freedom is the capacity to do evil.

According to Schelling, the human is distinguished from the eternal creative God by the specificity of his freedom which is essentially and inextricably a finite freedom. God is the being whose condition, though never completely immanent, can be actualized in its very existing. On the other hand, the finite being can never actualize itself completely because the ground of its existence remains inappropriable. This is the source of the fundamental melancholy of all finite beings. The distinction between the absolute freedom of the eternal being and the finite freedom of the mortal can be better understood with the help of Schelling’s distinction between the ground of existence and existence itself. This is not a formal distinction between sensuous nature and intelligible will, but a dynamic distinction of freedom. Eternal or finite, each being is a jointure of  the ground of existence and existence itself. In the eternal, creative being, this jointure is indissoluble. In the mortal, however, there can occur dissolution of this jointure. It is the possibility of the dissolution of the principles that explains the finitude of the finite being, and the freedom of this finite being. The human is essentially finite being, and only such a finite being is capable of evil. Therefore evil is neither divine nor beastly but essentially belongs to the human freedom. Evil has this peculiar, specific relation to human finitude. Unlike the beasts in whom the jointure of the principles is governed by necessity, and unlike the divine in whom the jointure of the principles is indissoluble, human freedom partakes of the divine freedom and is yet separated by an abyss. According to Schelling, this abyss is the possibility of dissolution of the principles.

In the dynamic freedom there are two oppositional principles that never reach equilibrium. In the coming to existence of the finite being there adhere these oppositional principles. There is the dark principle which is the principle of ground, and there is the ideal principle of light. The dark principle that operates in the realm of history as the principle of particularity is the principle of evil. Man is the finite being that unites in himself both of these principles in an equal measure. Since the nexus (band) of these principles in him is free and not governed by necessity, man is free to bring permutation to this nexus. Therefore what ought to remain as mere condition of existence, as mere principle of particularity, man can seek to elevate to totality or to universal domination. Out of this self-affirmation of the finite being who in this self-affirmation seeks to abnegate its very finitude, there arises evil. Thus while the possibility of evil is given to man in the coming into existence of this being, to actualize this principle of possibility is the work of human freedom. As mere ground, this principle is the very source of creative joy and affirmation of life, but elevating it into the universality or totality results into the most terrible form of evil that seeks to negate any form of its life-affirmative character. Thus the source of life and the origin of evil is grounded in the same principle. This principle is the human freedom whose origin remains unfathomable for man. According to Schelling, this unfathomable, inappropriable, unconditional freedom ought to remain inappropriable and unconditional, for the human creates a conditioned world on the basis of the unconditioned freedom. This conditioned world is history. By beginning this new “covenant”, man partakes the creativity of the divine freedom. This is the source of creative joy for the human, for through this creative act of human, the world of nature is redeemed.  But in his vain arrogance and in his self-affirmation that is pushed to the point of absolutization and totalization, the human seeks to negate the finite character of his freedom and thereby seeks to elevate the principle of particularity to the universal domination. Herein lays the evil when the non-being, which is for that matter is not completely devoid of being, seeks to attain the complete, absolute being. Evil is therefore neither being nor nothing, but non-being’s malicious hunger for being. Therefore power of evil cannot be said to be the power of being. It is rather the power of non-being that seeks to devour itself and is never satisfied at any point, because it never reaches being without a remainder of non-being. More it does not reach being, more self-consuming becomes its lust. According to Schelling such is the character of evil.

In The Ages of the World which was written between 1809-1827 and is  found in various incomplete versions, Schelling develops a narrative method that seeks to recount the stages of the world’s becoming through the agonal movement of conflictual forces. This is the germ of Schelling’s theory of potencies. The world as it exists has its ground in a dark, unfathomable past which no work of human reason can ever elevate into thought. This non-reason is not irrationality that is opposed to reason nor is it the negation of the possibility of reason but the ground of reason. Human reason thus exists only as a “regulated madness”. On account of its immanent force alone the human reason cannot attain the unconditioned which is the realm of absolute freedom. The emergence of the world-order is not seen as an immanent order ruled by the necessary principles of reason but has its source in an absolute, unconditional freedom. This freedom can arrive to the finite, mortal being as a gift. Man can never master this gift, because it opens man to his historicity. The essence of history is freedom. “The ages of the world” thus arises out of the unconditional character of freedom. This principle of freedom manifests itself in the agonal movement of contradictory forces, one repulsive and the other attractive. It is this agonal movement of oppositional forces that makes possible the emergence of “the ages of the world” out of the unconditional. This unconditional is that which cannot be further grounded in thought or in self-consciousness, it is what Schelling in his Freedom essay calls “the indivisible remainder” that constantly solicits from finite human beings ‘awe’ or ‘respect’.

Here as elsewhere Schelling’s thought wrestles with the question of the unconditioned. If there is anything that is singular to Schelling’s whole of philosophy, and that unifies Schelling’s often discontinuous philosophical career, it is this question of the unconditioned. Schelling does not explain the existence of the world with the help of logical categories. For Schelling, a rational system constitutive of logical categories cannot explicate the facticity or actuality of the world. It is the unconditional character of freedom whose ground is groundless (Abgrund), this freedom alone opens the world. Therefore there is always something excessive about freedom. In many texts, especially in his 1797 treatise, Schelling evokes a freedom which is not only a promise for the human but also a danger (Gefahr). “The ages of the world” is grounded by a condition which is excessive and unthinkable. The human belongs to the “un-pre-thinkable” ( Unvordenkliche). This is a promise as well as danger. Schelling evokes this excess to explain the possibility of the world and finite existence. This unconditional excess makes the world and being-in-the world as essentially finite and irreducibly mortal. It is this aspect of Schelling’s work that has most profoundly influenced the twentieth century philosophers like Franz Rosenzweig and Martin Heidegger.

d. Positive Philosophy

On 14 November 1831 Hegel died in Berlin. In 1840 Schelling was called to the now vacant chair in Berlin to replace Hegel. The following year Schelling began his lectures on  “positive philosophy” (Positivphilosophie) which was attended by Kierkegaard, Bakunin, Humboldt and Engels. These lectures were delivered in three phases:  Grounding of Positive Philosophy that introduces and grounds Positive Philosophy vis-à-vis the history of Negative Philosophy from Descartes onwards, followed by Philosophy of Mythology (Philosophie der Mythologie) and Philosophy of Revelation ( Philosophie der Offenbarung).

Schelling’s grounding of Positive Philosophy begins with the distinction between the “what” of being and “that being”. “What” of being is being as essence and “that” being is the contingent being’s pure actuality of existence. This actuality is not an attribute of being but its  existentiality, the very facticity of its coming into being. From here comes the distinction between a negative philosophy, that is, the rational philosophy that is essentially concerned with the essence of being (its ‘what’ character) and the positive philosophy that is concerned with the pure actuality of the existence of “that” being which comes into its being. Such a being (“that” being) is not a settled entity that is given, but that which comes into being . Schelling calls such a coming into being, existence. Since this coming into being is not a finished entity but yet becoming and always contingent, it cannot be grasped in the concept. Therefore existence and movement cannot be a logical category. There is a concept only if a being already exists, for by definition concept can only grasp the essence of being which in turn is possible if such a being already exists. Understood in this sense, negative philosophy is not concerned with the facticity of something that exists at all. Therefore it is not concerned with the question “why something exists at all?” The negative philosophy is rather concerned with the question: if and if something exists, what is its essence, what is the “being” character of this being irrespective of the problem whether such a being exists as “this” being at all.

For example, when Kant argues against the ontological proof of God, he argues neither for the existence of God nor for its non-existence. He only argues that the concept of God is not extendable to the existence of God because ‘existence’ cannot be predicated. In so far as ‘existence’ cannot be predicated, its actuality or facticity can only be for rational philosophy a presupposition. This presupposition is a point of beginning whose existence can only be deduced only if such an existence is already granted; only if such and such a being has already revealed itself. What then Kant’s philosophy shows, for Schelling, is the limit of negative philosophy, a limit that constitutes the possibility of negative philosophy. Schelling does not contest the possibility of negative philosophy, but precisely demands it however, on the condition that it recognizes this limit that is constitutive of it and does not pretend to be able to constitute itself as absolute system that includes the concept as well as existence of being. What Schelling finds problematic in Hegel is not that there should not be negative philosophy, but of Hegel’s claim to include existence in a system that is logical and purely negative system. For Schelling, Hegel’s extension of his negative notion of system to the Absolute totality without outside is without justification. For Schelling there always remains a remainder of such a system of negativity, which is the positivity of existence. Hegel’s system is founded upon purely negative relation of the finite being in relation to other finite beings where the unconditioned is supposed to be reached as a self-negation of negation. According to this conception, the unconditioned is the end result of a process of the self-cancellation of finite, conditioned entities. As early as 1804 in a lecture in Würzburg on The System of Philosophy in General Schelling contests this idea of the absolute as the end result of a process of the self-negation of finitude. According to Schelling, such a system is based upon a false premise and a presupposition. It presupposes to have reached the unity of being and thought, while it reaches such a unity merely in thought that means, only from negative side. It leaves out the pure actuality of existence whose unconditional character of its being cannot be merely the result of a dialectical process of the self-cancellation of finitude. Unlike Hegel’s claim, a purely negative philosophy cannot be presupposition-less. It presupposes what it cannot incorporate within its systemic edifice. This limitation of negative philosophy demands a positive philosophy that begins with the unconditionality of existence, with a prius whose existence can only be proved posteriori once there is a manifest world. Schelling called  such a positive philosophy, “metaphysical Empiricism”.  Hence the idea of a positive philosophy is where the ground is a presupposition. This presupposition is the unconditional existence of being whose pure actuality no rational knowledge based upon potentiality can ever attain. While the philosophical concept that is essentially concerned with essence can only elaborate the possibility of being, the actuality of being itself is beyond such categorical cognition, for the existence of this being exists as absolute freedom and not as a necessary consequence of a concept.

Here the limit of the Idealist notion of system is reached. Schelling in these lectures shows that the (Hegelian ) notion of the Subject presupposes as its condition that which cannot be further grounded in the Subject itself. One then has to begin from the pure actuality of existence, from a facticity, which is already always before self-consciousness and before thought’s ability to grasp it in the concept. This immemoriality of the origin is the “exuberance of being” that elicits from us awe or respect ( Achtung), because it exposes us to the Infinite that unconditionally and groundlessly exists. It thereby exposes us to our own finitude and mortality.

3. Influences

How deeply Schelling’s later philosophy has influenced Kierkegaard cannot be shown by quoting Kierkegaard or from Kierkegaard’s self-understanding. This can better be shown by understanding Kierkegaard’s anti-systematic notions of “existence”, “temporality” and “finitude” that he understands to be irreducible to the general order of the system. Like Schelling, Kierkegaard understands the question of existence as the highest question of philosophy. There is in existence something that cannot be grasped in the predicative. Likewise, in the realm of history there is a preponderant mass of contingencies that cannot be completely and exhaustively accounted by the speculative dialectical logic. The Post-Schellingian philosophies that are concerned with this problem have the source of their inspiration in Schelling’s later works. For Schelling neither history nor existence is a homogenous process leading straight, necessarily, to a telos of absolute knowledge by irresistible law which is auto-generative and anonymous. History is rather a field of polemos where agonal forces are at work. Kierkegaard’s The Concept of Anxiety begins with a Schellingian note. Kierkegaard here argues, in a manner that recalls Schelling’s critique of Hegel, that the notion of movement does not allow itself to be thought within the immanent speculative logic of Hegel, for the true movement presupposes transcendence which by definition a logical category cannot grasp. The task of Kierkegaard’s philosophy is to open towards an Archimedean point outside totality, or outside the general, normative order of validity. That point cannot be attained within the realm of the ethical, that is, within the homogenous order of universal norms, but in a “quantum leap” of faith. That leap of faith must pass through an existential experience of anxiety (Angst) which no phenomenology of spirit can thematize.

This anxiety has family resemblance with Schelling’s notion of anxiety of the mortal who constantly flees from the fire of the centre and takes shelter in the periphery. In Schelling as well as in Kierkegaard, especially in his Fear and Trembling, this anxiety manifests the irreducible finitude of the mortal being who is seized by the gaze of the wholly other, the divine, holding his hand, tearing him out of the totality of finite knowledge. In his Concluding Unscientific Postscript Kierkegaard attempts to open this universal order of the ethical to the notion of subjectivity, the subjectivity of that singular individual for whom transcendence of the wholly other is an existential interest. This existential interest, argues Kierkegaard, cannot be addressed within the immanent order of the system. One of the most prominent tendencies of the post-Schellingian philosophy is this question of existence from the religious point of view. For Schelling himself the question of religion remains irreducible to the rational-logical system of knowledge. The transcendence of the absolute cannot be reduced to a theodicy of history. As early as 1804, Schelling warned in his Philosophy and Religion against the danger of the acts of legitimacy by the earthly power in the name of the embodiment of the divine in the profane body. Religion for Schelling, as for Kierkegaard remains irreducible to the violence of a historical reason that constantly evokes a theological foundation for the justification of its domination. As against this theologico-political foundation, Kierkegaard evokes the whole other God. Thus religion cannot be used as the foundation of the profane in order to legitimize the power of earthly sovereignty, because religion essentially opens us to a non-foundation that eternally delegitimizes any earthly power, like the power of the State. In his 1804 lecture Philosophy and Religion and in his Stuttgart lectures of 1810, Schelling raises this important theologico-political question that has profound significance for our contemporary historical world. The recent upsurge of the question of political theology attempts to go back to Schelling to see how Schelling helps us to think of a critique of historical reason.

Such a question is pursued further by Franz Rosenzweig, a German Jewish philosopher who is contemporary of Martin Heidegger. Rosenzweig’s first scholarly work was his doctoral thesis on Hegel called Hegel and the State. In the wake of his horror of the First World War, Rosenzweig soon abandoned Hegelianism; his The Star of Redemption, which he wrote on post cards to his mother  when he was in the Balkan Front, is an anti-Hegelian work. In this book, that evokes Schelling’s later works as one of the main sources of inspiration, Rosenzweig envisions the messianic notion of history and redemption beyond the closure of a historical-speculative reason. This remarkable book begins with the question of existence which he takes from Schelling’s later works. It is the notion of the individual, finite existence whose fear of death cannot be consoled by the concept of the universal history. This demands opening up the closure of the universal historical reason to the arrival of redemption that is always to come. This eternity which is always to come, that alone can redeem the violence of a historical reason, does not itself belong to the “Philosophy of the All”. Rosenzweig’s critique of “the philosophy of the All” begins with Schellingian critique of Hegel, that existence precedes thought and thus it cannot be enclosed within the All. It is what falls outside totality or system, and in this manner opens the world to the messianic event of pure future. The messianic arrival of eternity does not allow itself to be reduced to the theological foundation of the profane order, like the power of the State. Thus the State is no longer an expression of the Absolute. Like Schelling, Rosenzweig’s later works are deeply suspicious of the theodicy of history that legitimizes the political sovereignty of the State.

The question of existence is important for Martin Heidegger’s early philosophical works. What Heidegger calls in his early works “hermeneutics of facticity” has resonance with Schelling’s notion of actuality of “that”, the pre-predicative, pre-conceptual and pre-categorical disclosure. The existential analytic of Dasein that Heidegger elaborates in his Being and Time and his deconstruction of the metaphysical foundation of logic has inspiration in Schelling’s attempt to open the system of negative philosophy to the more  originary revelation of being. Schelling’s positive philosophy seeks to release philosophy beyond its metaphysical foundation in the logic of the thinkable to a disclosure that can only be shown a posteriori . In this sense Schelling’s metaphysical empiricism is at once an exit from the metaphysics founded upon the notion of the predicative truth. What both Heidegger and Rosenzweig have sought to complete is this exit from metaphysics.  Heidegger’s 1936 lecture on Schelling shows the real importance of Schelling’s thinking for him.

The exit from metaphysics is a fundamental problem even for Marx. Ernst Bloch, whom Jürgen Habermas calls “Schellingian Marxist”, combines a certain version of Marxism and messianism that envisions a utopian fulfilment oriented towards the “not yet”. His The Spirit of Utopia and his later work The Principle of Hope evoke a notion of history that is disruptive, opening to the “not yet”, a fundamental affirmation of future which Schelling always insisted as the very creative, free task of philosophy. While Schelling has attempted to open the radical notion of future in a certain eschatological-theological manner, Bloch’s messianism is essentially an atheistic eschatology.

Schelling’s influence is seen to be growing in our contemporary philosophical world. Thus Jean Louis Chrétien, the French philosopher, has drawn on Schelling from a certain phenomenological perspective. In his Unforgettable and the Unhoped for, Chrétien is concerned with the immemoriality of a promise that arrives from the extremity of time, from an eschatos of future always to come. Chrétien draws here on Schelling’s notion of the eternal past which has not come to pass but that is always a past, an immemorial past that, being the principle of foundation, always opens the world to its futurity. Schelling indeed develops such a notion of an immemorial past in his The Ages of the World. Like Schelling in his various texts, Chrétien too evokes Plato’s notion of Anamnesis as remembrance, not of what has passed, but what has immemorially opened us to truth. What has found us, the excess that opens us to the world, is immemorially lost. For both Schelling and Chrétien, this is not the occasion of despair but the occasion of a creative freedom and the possibility of future.  In recent years the Anglophone philosophical world has been witnessing increased attention to Schelling’s works. This shows the continuing relevance of Schelling in our contemporary historical existence. Schelling’s philosophy has come to be interpreted and understood as a philosophy of affirmation and a philosophy of the exuberance of life as against petrified system of concepts. Jason Wirth’s recent work on Schelling rightly emphasizes the contemporaneity of Schelling for our concerns: our ethical concern with the primacy of Good over truth, the affirmation of life beyond the instrumental use of Reason, the affirmation of the more originary ecstatic temporality, and our deep ecological concerns. The ‘unconscious’ has psychoanalysis speaks of, evokes the notion of ‘unconscious’ in Schelling, the abyss that cannot be further grounded, and hence is unground. In Jacques Lacan’s term, it is the Real that never stops haunting, destabilizing and disturbing the symbolic order of the world. “The indivisible remainder” that Schelling speaks of in his 1809 Freedom essay  is that element of eternal nature as ground that never ceases de-constituting the cultural-historical order of totality. The symbolic order of a restrictive Reason never reaches totality, but always opens to an eternal remnant outside. This question has profound importance of Schelling for our time.

4. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Friedrich Wilhelm Joseph Schelling's Sämmtliche Werke, ed. K.F.A. Schelling, I Abtheilung Vols. 1-10, II Abtheilung Vols. 1-4, Stuttgart: Cotta, 1856-61.
  • Friedrich Wilhelm Joseph von Schelling, Ausgewählte Schriften, 6 Vols., ed. Manfred   Frank, Frankfurt: Suhrkamp 1985.
  • Aus Schellings Leben. In Briefen (three volumes), Adamant Media Corporations, 2003.
  • The Unconditional in Human Knowledge: Four early essays 1794-6 , trans. F. Marti, Lewisburg: Bucknell University Press, 1980.
  • Ideas for a Philosophy of Nature: as Introduction to the Study of this Science , trans. E.E. Harris and P. Heath with an introduction R. Stern, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1797/1988.
  • System of Transcendental Idealism, trans. P. Heath with an introduction by M. Vater, Charlottesville: University Press of Virginia, 1800/1978.
  • Bruno, or On the Natural and the Divine Principle of Things , trans. with an introduction by M. Vater, Albany: State University of New York Press, 1802/1984.
  • The Philosophy of Art , Minnesota: Minnesota University Press, 1802-03/1989.
  • On University Studies , trans. E.S. Morgan, ed. N. Guterman, Athens, Ohio: Ohio University Press, 1803/ 1966.
  • Philosophical Inquiries into the Nature of Human Freedom, trans. With an introduction by J. Gutmann, Chicago: Open Court, 1809/1936.
  • Clara : or On Nature’s Connection to the Spirit World, trans. Fiona Steinkamp, Albany: State University of New York Press, 1811/2002.
  • The Ages of the World, trans. Jason M. Wirth, Albany: State University of New York, 1811-15/2000.
  • The Ages of the World , trans. F. de W. Bolman, jr., New York: Columbia University Press, 1811-15/1967.
  • The Deities of Samothrace’ , trans. R.F. Brown, Missoula, Mont.: Scholars Press, 1815/1977.
  • On the History of Modern Philosophy, trans. Andrew. Bowie, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1833-4/1994.
  • Philosophie der Offenbarung . ed. M. Frank, Frankfurt: Suhrkamp, 1841-2/1977.
  • Historical-Critical  Introduction  to  the  Philosophy  of Mythology,    trans. Richey, M., Albany, NY: State University of New York Press, 2007.
  • The Grounding of Positive Philosophy: the Berlin Lectures , trans. Bruce Matthews, Albany, NY: State University of New York Press, 2008.
  • Philosophy and Religion , Spring Publications, 2010.
  • Idealism and the Endgame of Theory , trans. Thomas Pfau , Albany: State University of New York, 1994.
  • Philosophy of German Idealism: Fichte, Jacobi and Schelling, ed. Ernst Behler , Contuum, 1987.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Beach, Edward Allen, The Potencies of God(s): Schelling’s Philosophy of Mythology,         Albany: State University of New York Press, 1994.
  • Behun, William A. The Historical Pivot: Philosophy of History in Hegel, Schelling and Hölderlin , Triad Press, 2006
  • Beiser, Frederick C., German Idealism: Struggle Against Subjectivism , Harvard: Harvard University Press, 2008.
  • Bowie, Andrew, Aesthetics and Subjectivity: from Kant to Nietzsche, Manchester:    Manchester University Press, 1990.
  • Bowie, Andrew, Schelling and Modern European Philosophy: An Introduction,     London: Routledge, 1993
  • Brown, Robert F., The Later Philosophy of Schelling: The Influence of Boehme in the Works of 1809-1815 , The Associated University Press, 1977
  • Courtine, Jean-Francois , Extase de la raison. Essais sur Schelling, Paris, Galilée, 1990
  • Distaso, Leonardo V., The Paradox of Existence : Philosophy and Aesthetics in the Young Schelling, Springer, 2010
  • Esposito, Josephe L., Schelling’s Idealism and Philosophy of Nature, Associated University Press, 1977
  • Fackenheim, Emil, The God Within: Kant, Schelling and Historicity , ed. John W. Burbridge, University of Toronto Press, 1996
  • Frank, Manfred, Der Unendliche Mangel an Sein, Frankfurt: Suhrkamp, 1975
  • Frank, Manfred, Eine Einführung in Schellings Philosophie, Frankfurt: Suhrkamp, 1985
  • Frank, Manfred, Selbstbewußtsein und Selbsterkenntnis, Stuttgart: Reclam, 1991
  • Frank, M. (ed).  with Kurz, G., Materialien zu Schellings philosophischen Anfängen, Frankfurt: Suhrkamp, 1975
  • Freydberg, Bernard, Schelling’s Dialogical Freedom Essay: Provocative Philosophy Then and Now , State University of New York Press, 2009
  • Geldhof, J, Revelation, Reason and Reality: Theological Encounters with Jaspers, Schelling and Baader, Peeters, 2007
  • Goudeli, Kyriaki, Challenges to German Idealism: Schelling, Fichte and Kant, Palgrave Macmillan, 2003
  • Grant, Ian Hamilton, Philosophies of Nature After Schelling, Continuum, 2008
  • Hegel, G.W. F., The Difference between Fichte’s and Schelling’s System of Philosophy, Albany: State University of New York Press, 1977
  • H