Category Archives: History of Philosophy

Benedict de Spinoza: Epistemology

spinozaThe theory of knowledge, or epistemology, offered by the 17th century Dutch philosopher Benedict de Spinoza may yet prove to be the most daring in the history of philosophy. Not only does Spinoza claim to be able to know all the ways one can know something, he also claims to be able to know what everything is. Few philosophers besides Spinoza have sought and proclaimed possession of absolute knowledge quite like he had. Of the philosophers who have claimed absolute knowledge, only Spinoza has offered it, not as the reception of a divine revelation, and not as the fulfillment of a historical process, as in Hegel's epistemology, but as a means for intuitively affirming the truth inherent within all of reality. Reality is susceptible to such an intuition, he said, because every being is a mode of it, or a way that it expresses itself. In other words, for us to come to know the "absolute" is for the absolute to come to know itself. There is thus something basically self-reflexive and introspective about Spinoza’s epistemology. At the same time, knowledge for Spinoza is always of what he calls God or Nature, which can also be understood as the universe itself.

However, whether or not Spinoza’s epistemology is valid by any standard besides his own, remains a point of contention. Most philosophers believe that Spinoza’s epistemology wildly oversteps the limits of human finitude, while others believe that even if Spinoza certainly experienced something within himself that he called "the truth," we have no real access to it ourselves. This article explores the role and function of knowledge in Spinoza’s philosophy as a whole and the methodology he uses to know things and to know knowledge. The article closely follows Spinoza’s threefold division of the different types of knowledge as  presented in his Ethics. This threefold division is constituted by the distinctions among imagination, intuition, and the exercise of the intellect.

Table of Contents

  1. The Role of Knowledge in Spinoza’s Philosophy
    1. Why Search for Knowledge?
    2. Knowledge in the Ethics
  2. Spinoza’s Method for Epistemology
    1. The Geometric Method
    2. The Sub Specie Model, or Perspectivism
  3. The First Kind of Knowledge
    1. Imagination
    2. Prejudice and Superstition
    3. Miracles, Prophecy, and Revelation
  4. The Second Kind of Knowledge
    1. Intellection
    2. Common Notions
    3. Reason
  5. The Third Kind of Knowledge
    1. Intuition
    2. Love and Blessedness
  6. References and Further Reading

1. The Role of Knowledge in Spinoza’s Philosophy


Spinoza’s philosophy as a whole can be seen as continuous reflection on the role and function of knowledge itself. As a rationalist, along with Descartes and Leibniz, he was concerned with improving the power of the intellect, with its inherent capacity to reason, so that it could overcome the obscurity and confusion of our everyday perceptions. Spinoza’s first attempt at writing philosophy was a treatise intended to teach us how to best utilize our natural, rational powers so as to overcome our enslavement to the partial knowledge supplied by the senses. This work was the Treatise on the Emendation of the Intellect (TdIE). Spinoza wrote this work, it is believed, in the early 1660s, but he never finished it. In the treatise, Spinoza begins with an autobiographical moment that explains to the reader why he wanted to improve or emend the intellect.

1a. Why Search for Knowledge?


Spinoza sees the obtaining of true knowledge to be the sole avenue for liberating oneself from the limits and fallibility of an average human existence. Both for the mind and the body, Spinoza is searching for a way we can come to correct ourselves and thus know reality with a certainty that would guarantee for us a thoroughly active and affirmative existence, which is an existence defined solely by the active affects of joy and love. There is, therefore, also an ethical aspect to the improvement of the mind that a search for true knowledge is intended to yield. Spinoza calls the joy which a true knowledge of things would imply the “true good.” Such a “true good” is not merely an ephemeral happiness, but instead an eternal joy. Spinoza writes:

After experience had taught me that all the things which regularly occur in ordinary life are empty and futile, and I saw that all the things which were the cause or object of my fear had nothing of good or bad in themselves, except insofar as [my] mind was moved by them, I resolved at last to try to find out whether there was anything which would be the true good, capable of communicating itself, and which alone would affect the mind, all others being rejected—whether there was something which, once found and acquired, would continuously give me the greatest joy, to eternity (TdIE 1).

Spinoza does not deny that searching for true knowledge is a risky gesture. To sacrifice the pleasantries and safety of what everyday experience provides and proclaims as certain is to risk interrupting the comfort of one’s normal routine. In light of this, Spinoza sought to search for true knowledge in a way that would not violate the comfort of his everyday existence, but that would reject what humans usually take to be the highest goods: “riches, honor, and sensual pleasure” (TdIE 3). What this means is that true knowledge will not make you money, give you a popular reputation, or even offer you any momentary delights. Spinoza’s own biography attends to this fact. However, Spinoza was no ascetic. For him, true knowledge does not consist in any misanthropic disavowal of the plight of human beings. Rather, obtaining true knowledge will simply allow one to live with the internal confidence that existence is not defined merely by the indefinite search for finite pleasures. True knowledge will instead empower its possessor to the extent that s/he will be unperturbed by the vacillating conflict of the emotions, or affects, that determine the everyday existence of most humans. In this sense, Spinoza’s emphasis on the affective power of true knowledge is very similar to Stoicism. Ultimately, we should search for true knowledge not only because it will improve our inherent rational ability to check and control our reactive and passive emotions and drives, but because true knowledge will lead us to a direct experience of the essence of all reality, which is an experience that liberates us from finite concerns and endows us with the power and virtue of true blessedness. For Spinoza, true blessedness is an expression of intellectual love towards an eternal and infinite entity: God or Nature. We should search for true knowledge because it will allow us to become truly blessed and wise. Wisdom is true blessedness, or beatitude, for Spinoza. To emend the intellect so that it can use its reason to control its emotions will also allow it, along with becoming wise, to discover the true laws of Nature and common properties of all things. Checking its natural tendency toward reactive passivity and confused perceptions is the self-cultivation of a power essential to the intellect. An emended intellect is, therefore, the perfection of a way of knowing and existing that has searched for and obtained true knowledge.

1b. Knowledge in the Ethics


The most mature statement of Spinoza’s philosophy is his Ethics. The Ethics is composed of five parts. The first part gives us Spinoza’s ontology. It deals primarily with what Spinoza regards to be the one true substance or thing that defines reality, which is, once again, God or Nature. Spinoza felt that, prior to discovering how one can know anything, it was best to start any philosophic investigation by establishing the very nature of what is. Getting to God as quickly as possible was only almost an injunction for Spinoza. Spinoza was a substance monist, which means he thought that everything is essentially one thing or substance and that all things are so many modes or ways it modifies or affects itself. The one substance that is everything is infinitely self-causing, self-expressing, and self-sustaining. It is all-powerful, perfect, and real. There is thus only one substance in Nature, as opposed to the many substances philosophers from Aristotle to Descartes had presumed, and that substance is Nature itself. Substance is an indivisible entity of which everything is a modification. The essence of substance, which is its eternal and necessary existence, is what Spinoza calls the attributes. While there is in essence an absolute and indivisible infinity of attributes, we know only two of these attributes: thought and extension. We can know thought and extension because we are ourselves modes of them. Thought is an infinite power of thinking that is God’s idea of himself, while we, our minds and all our thoughts, are so many ways God modifies himself by constitutively expressing himself through an indefinite amount of finite thoughts. In other words, God has and is every idea, while we are just our idea of our ideas of our body and the other bodies that affect us. Extension, likewise, is an infinite power of acting that is God’s infinite and self-causal body (for he is Nature and Nature is essentially physical), while we, our bodies and all the bodies that compose and affect us, are so many ways God modifies himself by constitutively expressing himself through an indefinite amount of finite bodies. In other words, God has and is every body—he is Nature’s naturing (natura naturans)—while we are just our body’s drive to persevere as it intends to actively make stronger compositions with other bodies.

The second part of the Ethics is about the human mind and how it has the ability to emend itself so it can come to know not only its own essence as a finite thing, but also the infinite essence of which it is a mode. The second part teaches us how we can come to know how we are a way God infinitely expresses and continuously causes himself to exist, which is to say we can come to know God’s attributes. We will deal with this part of the Ethics extensively in the sections to come. If the second part teaches us how to strengthen our minds so we can come to know what we really are and how we actually exist as thinking things, then the next two parts of the Ethics (the third dealing with the affects and the fourth their strength) teaches us how to strengthen our bodies so we can come to physically be what we really are and how we actually exist as extended things essentially defined by a desire to persevere. The fifth and final part of the Ethics, dealing with Spinoza’s definition of freedom, synthesizes these approaches and teaches us how to immediately intuit and affirm the infinite and eternal essence we had come to know and embody through the prior parts. The role of knowledge in the Ethics is, therefore, both essential and integral. Through an improvement of our knowledge we can come to be strong and free, or wise and blessed. Spinoza’s understanding and use of knowledge in the Ethics is presented as a way for giving us the means to discover not only the different ways we can know reality, but also the best way we can know it. The ultimate goal of showing us what knowledge is and how we can render it truer—thereby emboldening it with a certain adequacy, power, and clarity and distinctness—is to enable us to obtain that eternal joy which is the very reason why we search for true knowledge in the first place. The role and function of knowledge in the Ethics is to be that way through which we can come to adequately, actively, and rationally exist.

2. Spinoza’s Method for Epistemology

Implied in Spinoza’s epistemology is the admission that there are a variety of ways one can have knowledge. It is also implied in Spinoza epistemology that there is a definitively adequate way for knowing this variety of ways. Spinoza’s method for his epistemology has two aspects, one that is formal and another that is more concerned with the concrete perspectives that define the different ways one can have knowledge.

2a. The Geometric Method


It might appear strange that Spinoza waits until part II of the Ethics to address the human mind and the different ways it can have knowledge, considering that the search for the freedom and blessedness of true knowledge is the stated purpose of his thinking. The reason he does this is because of the structural demands of the form in which he wrote the Ethics. Spinoza writes the Ethics in geometric form, which entails that in each part of the text the formal presentation of his arguments involve the use of definitions, axioms, propositions, demonstrations, proofs, scholia, and so on. Formally, the Ethics is written in a way that is similar to Euclid’s Elements. Also, Descartes had popularized the use of geometric form in Spinoza’s time. In opposition to Descartes, however, Spinoza preferred a more synthetic geometric approach than an analytic one. Synthesis is a way of combining primary or axiomatic truths already established as indubitable or self-evident in order to reach other primary truths. To utilize a synthetic geometric method allows one to start with certain ultimate conclusions or truths in order to build a new knowledge from them by demonstrating and proving propositions on their basis. This is why Spinoza starts with God, the one substance that is everything. There are things about God or Nature that simply cannot be denied and that must serve as the basis from which all other knowledge will be derived: that he essentially exists, that he is absolutely infinite, self-causal, conceivable as existing only in and through himself, omnipotent, omniscient, and eternally existing of necessity.

So, in a sense, Spinoza already has absolute knowledge before he reaches it. While the synthetic geometric method was that powerful for him, Spinoza also knew that we, as readers, still needed to progress through the entirety of his text in order to see if and how he was right. Believing that what Spinoza establishes as axiomatically certain is in fact so is a necessary gesture on our part if we are to come to know how Spinoza can start with such perfect knowledge. In other words, Spinoza writes the rest of his Ethics for a reason when he could have just as easily cut everything off after part I, and that reason is that he wants to teach us what we, quite paradoxically, already know as well. The knowledge we all already have is what Spinoza himself explicitly knows as he put it into axiomatic form. The process of coming to have knowledge, for Spinoza, is thus always an explication of a knowledge that is eternally implied in every mind. Spinoza uses the axiomatic geometric form so he does not have to waist time by starting from scratch and eventually discovering the very basis from which he can start through the simple establishment of definitions and axioms. This can be seen as the reason why he never completed the TdIE as well, because it began with the natural inadequacy of our everyday knowledge and sought to overcome it through an almost analytic process of forming a basis from which future knowledge would be capable of discovering the very truth of God that Spinoza and, according to him, we all already know. Such an analytic approach was Descartes’ in his Meditations and it was also probably the main inspiration for Spinoza’s writing the TdIE in the way that he did. By beginning with God and what is absolutely true of him in the Ethics, Spinoza could then show us the variety of ways in which we are inherently both inadequately and adequately knowing God from the start. Spinoza found the destructive tendencies of the analytic method, especially of Descartes’ hyperbolic doubt, to be superfluous because if one has the truth it is not doubted and if it is doubted then it is not the truth and you do not have it.

For Spinoza, it is not that we do not have knowledge of God. The problem is that our knowledge is usually quite poor and confused. But merely by following Spinoza through the Ethics, because of its synthetic geometric form, we come to know that we already have a knowledge that is, in an everyday sense, quite poor. The way to come to know adequately then what we always already know inadequately is to come to know the different ways that knowledge can be known and the different ways knowledge knows things, both of which will become utterly identical through the reflexivity demanded by Spinoza’s epistemology. Such reflexivity, therefore, will constitute Spinoza’s actual method for doing epistemology insofar as the geometric method is the formal presentation of its synthetic necessities, but not its precise application to the different kinds of knowledge. Spinoza says as much in the TdIE when he argues that any true method must be “reflexive knowledge” (TdIE 38). This is not to say that Spinoza’s geometric method does not itself imply reflexivity, but that it is more the form in which a truly reflexive epistemology can be invented and utilized.

2b. The Sub Specie Model, or Perspectivism


The truly reflexive way Spinoza does epistemology can be called the sub specie model. Sub specie is Latin for “under the species or aspect of,” or “from the perspective of.” Each aspect or perspective of knowledge is a way of knowing. Spinoza uses the phrase when speaking of how, when we use the common notions and reason that define the second kind of knowledge, we perceive reality “under a certain species of eternity” (EIIP44C2). True knowledge for Spinoza, as we will see, means that one shifts one’s perspective away from imagining reality in terms of the abstractions and quantifications implied by using time (and space) to measure an indefinitely enduring finite existence, to intellectually conceiving reality from the perspective of its own true and indivisible eternity. Insofar as there is only one substance, one real thing, in and as the universe for Spinoza, when we have any knowledge, whether it is true or false, it is necessarily going to be of this substance. The sub specie model states that all the ways of knowing are different ways of knowing one thing and not different ways of knowing substantially different things. Each way of knowing is a perspective on one substance. While our knowledge may be perceived as changing, what we know cannot be truly perceived in such a way.

The sub specie model is reflexive because it allows Spinoza to know how knowledge actually functions while still sustaining his substance monism. He retains his substance monism by affirming the existence of the great variety of ways humans, and moreover all beings, can have knowledge as being so many ways God expresses himself. If all ways of knowing are ways God is known, then God himself, insofar as he is absolutely self-causal and self-expressive, would have to thereby know himself through and as all the different ways he is known. Therefore, from the perspective of God, God knows himself in an infinity of ways, while we, in our everyday existence and from our finite perspective, are just so many of these infinite ways God can both inadequately and adequately know all of reality as himself. But, does this mean that God is actually false as he knows himself inadequately through us? Yes, but only from a finite, limited, and inadequate perspective. On the other hand, while God essentially is the way we know him naturally and inadequately, he is also the adequate knowledge of our inadequate knowledge insofar as he absolutely knows all the ways he is known; or more precisely, he adequately knows himself in every way, from every perspective, he is known. God’s knowledge, therefore, is the absolutely self-reflexive epistemological model we must try to express, experience, embody, intuit, and know if we are to come to have true knowledge ourselves. In other words, we must become as epistemologically self-reflexive as God; that is, we must come to know our inadequate knowledge in the exact way or from the very perspective God adequately knows it.

To come to have adequate or true knowledge is first to come to know how our everyday, finite knowledge is just a way, a particular perspective, of having knowledge and that it is a perspective on God just like every other way of knowing. For us to have an adequately reflexive knowledge is for us to have a reflexive knowledge of God’s reflexive knowledge. That is, we must think God from his own absolutely self-reflexive, self-knowing perspective in order to have adequate knowledge, an adequate knowledge that is both of God and ourselves. For Spinoza, to have an adequate knowledge of epistemology, or adequate knowledge of the ways knowledge knows and is known, is to have an adequate epistemology of epistemology itself. Yet, we must now see how we can arrive at such knowledge. Now we must see the three main ways humans can have knowledge and how we can come to have God’s absolute knowledge of these ways from the absolute perspective he has on himself. We must see how we can shift our perspective to that of God’s absolute perspectivism. We must come to know how we can know reality sub specie aeternitatis.

3. The First Kind of Knowledge

Spinoza defines the first kind of knowledge as the lowest or most inadequate kind. It is also the natural way humans have knowledge. The first kind of knowledge is humanity’s perspective on reality. Spinoza, echoing Parmenides’ [] distinction between aletheia, or truth, and doxa, calls it opinion. The first kind of knowledge is also the only source of falsity (EIIP41).

3a. Imagination


For Spinoza, the human being is a singular thing, which means that it has a finite and determined existence (IID7). From one perspective, the human is a mind or thinking thing (IIA2). The human mind both has ideas and is itself an idea. From another perspective, the human is also an extended thing, or a finite and determined body. The human body is both composed of a great many bodies and is affected by a great many other bodies. The human mind and all its thoughts think nothing but the human body, the bodies that go to compose it, and the bodies that affect it (IIP12, 13). The human mind is the idea of the human body and it involves and expresses through all of its ideas all the bodies that compose its body and all the bodies that cause, affect, and determine it. The mind, in its naturally determined singularity, thinks nothing but its body’s affections. Affections are the states or conditions of a body’s reaction to another body’s affecting it. They are the ways both how our body reacts to being affected and how our mind thinks such reactions. From the perspective of the body, affections are usually expressions of receptivity, reactivity, passivity, and weakening on the part of the affected body. Affections are also feelings. Spinoza defines affections in terms of the physical affects, which are the ways the body becomes either stronger or weaker, or more joyful or sad (IIID3). Usually, one’s affections enslave one to a passive existence defined by a diminishing of one’s drive to persevere through forming greater and stronger compositions with other stronger bodies. From the perspective of the mind, affections are images of its affected body (and its increase or decrease in active power or freedom) and the bodies that affect it. Even though affections are things reactively received, they are also those thoughts through which the mind can posit as present the actual existence of its own affected body and all the bodies that affect it. As images, affections are still, even while passively received, essentially positive. Spinoza writes, “the affections of the human body whose ideas present external bodies as present to us, we shall call images of things…and when the mind regards bodies in this way, we shall say that it imagines” (IIP17S).

Now, for Spinoza, the human mind has knowledge of the singular existence of any body insofar as it imagines it. The problem, however, is that any knowledge based on passive affections, or images, is a partial, confused, mutilated (or fragmented), and inadequate knowledge. “Insofar as the human mind imagines an external body, it does not have an adequate knowledge of it” (IIP26C). Any idea, which is itself also an image, of an affection that is an image of an affected or affecting body inadequately expresses the true nature of such bodies. An image is inadequate, an inadequate idea, because it expresses only a confused and mutilated understanding of how a body affects another and what a body essentially is as a self-causal and affecting entity. For a body to imagine other bodies as actively, affectively, and causally determining the form of its existence is for a body to betray its own very minimal ability to be active, affective, and causal itself. Imagination is, therefore, submission to external determination. Through the imagination, a singular mind and body is defined solely by how other bodies determine its existence. The inadequacy of imagining is an expression of mental and physical weakness, for it is only a partial explanation of how bodies are essentially active and self-causally striving for an enhanced perseverance. An inadequate knowledge—a knowledge that merely posits as presently existing externally affective bodies and one’s own passively affected body—is a weak knowledge and, for Spinoza, is thus the very definition of falsity.

As long as I am merely receiving my affections and passively imagining the bodies that affect me, I express an inadequate and false knowledge of things. As long as I merely imagine bodies, I am not internally self-determining and explicitly expressive of the truly self-causal and active essence of all things and myself. Images are like the scars or traces bodies leave on me as they batter me because of my mental and physical sadness and weakness. Images are “like conclusions without premises” (IIP28D). By merely imagining bodies, I am enslaved to the common order of Nature, with its incessantly active, functioning, and self-causally moving bodies. By being so enslaved I understand Nature’s common order not in its inherently intellectual rationality, but rather as the fortuitous run of circumstance one endures through casual, vague, and random experiences (IIP40S2). It is important to emphasize, however, that the positivity implicit in false ideas cannot be the cause of their falsity, and that falsity does not involve a total privation of knowledge. Images are not non-beings devoid of all expressive content. Falsity is still an expression of the fact that all singular things exist; it is just that it is the weakest way of knowing this fact.  In other words, inadequacy is the lowest degree of actual and active knowing and existing for Spinoza. Falsity is the poorest way of knowing God or Nature, that is, the poorest way it knows itself.

Spinoza defines a few other characteristics of the falsity of the first kind of knowledge. Affections, or images, are the sensations through which singular beings think and feel their externally determined bodies. Knowledge that stems entirely from sense perception is inadequate and false. Sense perception also defines a kind of knowing that forms only fictitious ideas of things (TdIE 52-56). These fictions are uncertain ideas of what constitutes the essential and necessary existence of things. Knowledge of the first kind is also knowledge based on signs and hearsay (TdIE 19). Signs and hearsay, along with all knowledge based on memory, give us knowledge of “almost everything that is of practical use in life” (TdIE 20). The good and common sense that makes everyday experiences and relations possible involve neither the clarity and distinctness nor the internal and self-causal adequacy that the truth requires. Instead, an everyday human existence is defined by a collective opining on the part of a multitude of singular beings that do not have the rational strength to overcome their enslavement to partially expressing through fragmented and confused ideas their passivity and externally determined existence.

3b. Prejudice and Superstition


One of Spinoza’s favorite examples of falsity is the illusion of free will that is so often propagated by the mutilated imagination of human beings. It is a natural prejudice of humans to assume they have liberty. Spinoza writes, “men are deceived in that they think themselves free [i.e., they think that, of their own free will, they can either do a thing or forbear doing it], an opinion which consists only in this, that they are conscious of their actions and ignorant of the causes by which they are determined” (EIIP35S). Humans imagine they get to make choices because their knowledge is an inadequate expression of what actually determines them to do everything they do, which includes them imagining they have free will. Spinoza is a thinker of determinism and necessitarianism. Humans are necessarily determined to be prejudicial and not know why or how. It is natural law, for Spinoza, that “men are born ignorant of the causes of things” (IApp). Spinoza next notes that humans often turn their prejudicial assumption of free will into the dogma of divine choice. Humans take their imaginary freedom based on contingency and possibility and apply it to a transcendent creator of the entire universe. The human image of God is of a being with an omnipotent reservoir of choices. Because humans find such an image staggering they are terrified they may choose something (namely, a form of worship) that God either has not himself chosen or that he has deemed to be morally reprehensible. Humans thus allow their prejudicial free will to congeal into a superstitious obsession with the impenetrable and inexhaustible free will of God (IApp). All of this is grossly inadequate and false, for Spinoza, for it merely doubles the error of free will and enslaves singular beings to an almost complete irrationality.

3c. Miracles, Prophecy, and Revelation


Another example of falsity that Spinoza gives is an extension of prejudice and superstition. It is the religious instinct to believe in the miraculous and prophetic, both of which depend upon the imagined reception of the revelation of God’s free choices. In the case of miracles, the necessity of natural laws is broken by an ultimately unknowable divine decision (TTP, 6). Once again, humans explain away their ignorance of the causes that determine them by imagining a substantial interruption in the natural order of things. While a miracle is imagined to provide humans with what they perceive to be an advantage, an omen is the negative counterpart to a miracle, but it still expresses the same falsity. Certain types of humans take advantage, for political purposes, of the inadequacy of the prejudicial and superstitious nature of those who are susceptible to believing in miracles and omens—that is, the multitude—by declaring their own ability to receive directly the revelation of the immediate results of God’s choices and commands. These beings are prophets and priests, and prophecy for Spinoza is nothing but a clever way of exploiting and disciplining the multitude through the use of an agile and vivid imagination (TTP, 1). For Spinoza, “revelation has occurred through images alone” (TTP, 1), which means that all religions based on revelation are essentially false. Revelation is an utterly inadequate and inappropriate way of understanding God.

4. The Second Kind of Knowledge

In light of the passive and inadequate state of our everyday knowledge and existence, beset as we are by an external determination of our singular existence by all the bodies we confusedly imagine as affecting us, Spinoza aims to establish the ways in which we can overcome our falsity and weakness and come to have an adequate and active knowledge. The first step to becoming adequate for Spinoza is for one to actively and reflexively shift one’s perspective away from the imagination to that of the rational powers inherent to the intellect. This self-activation of the intellect occurs through the formation of common notions, which are concepts that express the universal properties of all things.

4a. Intellection


Spinoza never supplied a clear-cut definition of the intellect. He appears to offer three different kinds of intellects. One is simply our finite mind. Another is the immediately caused and infinite in kind modal intellect that is common to and shared by all finite intellects. And there is a third kind of intellect that is God’s absolutely infinite and indivisibly self-causal thinking of himself, or the attribute of thought itself that goes to define God’s essential existence. These three intellects are implicit in each other as they are taken from their own explicit perspectives. From the explicit perspective of the finite intellect, for example, the imagination constitutes the vast majority of one’s thoughts, even though, Spinoza argues, implicit to a finite thinking is the infinite in kind thinking of which it is a part and the indivisibly infinite thinking it truly and essentially is. In order to emend our finite intellect so that it is no longer enslaved to imagining, but instead conceives what is implicit to its thinking, Spinoza shows us how to reflect upon the very nature of our minds and find what it is about it that we know with a fair degree of certainty. By reflecting upon our imagination we cannot but notice that imagining is the way we necessarily think in our usual condition and that we, even prior to noting that we are necessarily imagining beings, also notice that we are necessarily things that think. It is through this reflection upon the natural necessity of the inadequacy of our thinking that we begin to affirm with a certain clarity and distinctness something essential about ourselves as thinking things and so shift our perspective away from only explicitly imagining. For Spinoza, it follows from the necessity of the order of Nature that human beings inadequately imagine all that affects them and thus also imagine all of what they think (EIIP36). But it is this very thought of the necessity of our being singular entities that inadequately imagine that activates the powers of our intellect. By intellectually affirming the natural necessity that we as imagining beings are determined from without and follow a natural order, we can thereby come to know and internally affirm our own essential necessity in light of this order. The activation of the finite intellect is also the self-ordering of the affections or images that usually constitute a finite mind. To intellectually order one’s affections in the way they are necessarily and naturally determined is to begin to know both the conditions for their being caused and what in fact causes them as so many modes that follow and flow from an infinite mode of God.

An active finite intellect is a mind that knows that it falsely imagines the bodies that affect it. But to know one’s falsity truly for Spinoza is for one to know the truth because the truth is the standard both of itself and falsity (IIP43S). By reflecting on such a slight enhancement of knowledge, a finite intellect can increase its activity even more by beginning to understand the necessity and natural order it now knows it follows, and now orders its affection in accordance with, as being something of which it is a part and mode. For a mind, as it begins to actively conceive of its nature as a way Nature necessarily functions and follows from itself, it can begin to use its intellective capacities to know the essence of the infinite thinking that must be common to it and that it must be a way or mode of in order to be a thinking thing at all. For a body, as it begins to actively affect and determine the bodies that were formerly affecting and determining it, it can begin to compose greater composites of other bodies with these bodies it now determines and so strengthen its own essential activity and joy. In order for both the mind and the body to do this, what is common to all singular beings must be adequately known and conceived.

4b. Common Notions

Spinoza argues that what is common to all singular things cannot constitute the essence merely of one or an indefinite amount of particular things, but rather must be “equally in the part and the whole” (IIP37) of all singular things. This is because “those things which are common to all, and which are equally in the part and in the whole, can only be conceived adequately” (IIP38). The question is then, what is common to all singular things? If the intellect is activated through an affirmation of the necessity of the natural order of determinations it is a part of, it becomes even more active if it can conceive what all intellects must constitute as the entire or whole order of thinking itself. What is common to all finite intellects is an infinite intellect of which they are all modes and parts. For a finite intellect to conceive of the whole infinite intellect that it goes to compose, and thus is a way that it modifies itself, is for it to render its thinking adequate. The adequacy of conceiving what is common to all finite thinking is an expression of truth, or clarity and distinctness, for Spinoza.

All singularly thinking things agree in certain respects. One way they all agree is that they are all determined to imagine affections. Another is the simple fact that they all think. And another is that they all modify both an infinite in kind thinking, which is the inherent unity of all thinking as it is immediately caused by God, and also an indivisibly infinite thinking, which is God’s absolute thought of himself. All intellects are modes of an infinite intellect conceivable both as an immediately caused unity of finite intellects and an indivisible identity of all intellectual activity as being one absolutely infinite and eternally self-causal thinking. Spinoza argues that the common notion of the infinite intellect—from both its infinite in kind, immediately caused and indivisibly infinite, self-causal perspectives—is “common to all men” (IIP38C), which also means that it is inherent to the finite intellects of all singular beings. Every thinking thing cannot but implicitly think what is common to it, what it shares with other thinking things, what it is a part of, what it is essentially a unity of, and what it essentially is as a way God thinks himself. The process whereby a finite intellect thinks its inherent common notions is the active becoming of its explicit expression of the truth of all thinking things. The common notion the finite intellect adequately expresses as it becomes increasing active and self-determined is the clear and distinct idea of the immediate and infinite in kind intellect it modifies by being a part of it and the attribute of thought it modifies as an indivisible way God modifies itself.

There is another common notion implicit to an activated and adequate finite intellect, and it is a conception of what is common to all singular bodies. Insofar as all thoughts are actually the bodies and affections they think because of Spinoza’s doctrine of the parallel identity of thoughts and bodies, the common notions of the infinite intellect and the attribute of thought are also clear and distinct conceptions of the immediate and infinite in kind mode of extension and extension itself. It is of the nature of bodies first of all to be extended things. Secondly, it is of the nature of all extended things to indefinitely compose with and decompose each other. All bodies agree in that they are all each both parts of a larger whole and themselves wholes with parts. The fact that all bodies are alive for Spinoza leads this compositional structure of all bodies to be constantly in flux. Therefore, what is also common to all bodies, along with being extended composites, is the fact that they are all moving at different speeds. To be a singular body is to be an indefinitely composing and decomposing extended composite that speeds up or slows down (IIP13, Ep 32). Spinoza calls the immediate and infinite in kind mode of extension “motion and rest.” Motion and rest is the whole or unity of all bodies conceived as one individual body that is all the degrees of compositional movement. All singular bodies are modes of motion and rest, which is itself the immediate and infinite in kind mode of the indivisibly infinite and absolutely self-modifying attribute of extension, or what Spinoza calls Nature naturing (natura naturans). Motion and rest parallels the infinite in kind intellect, and both are in essence the attributes they immediately modify and follow from, which is God’s indivisibly self-causal essence.

4c. Reason


Spinoza next needs to show us how we can conceive of these common notions through our affections. For Spinoza, we are very affected. The more we are affected the more we think, but usually imagine, what affects us. But now we know how to adequately conceive of the true nature, the essential properties, of all singular things. Through common notions we can open ourselves up to a plethora of affections without becoming enslaved to them because of our reflexive and perspectival ability to know the necessity and intellectual order of all things, that is, to know all things either as ways an infinite intellect thinks or as ways the whole of Nature compositionally moves. To be active and affirmative toward one’s affections is to use reason to understand how they determine one to exist. But reason is not merely a calm reception of affections. Through an adequate conception and utilization of the reasoning power of the common notions one can become the active cause of all of what one is affected by. The power to be affectively causal in one’s own right is reason’s ability to make us truly free. True freedom, for Spinoza, is the affirmative following of divine or natural necessity. By being rational one can control and order all of one’s affections by conceiving what it truly common to what one is affected by and thus thinks. To open oneself up to an indefinite amount of affections, and yet still rationally control one’s reactions to them, is to actually compose with all such bodies by forming a greater, stronger, and more joyful whole. Through a rational use of the implicit truth and power of the common notions inherent to the intellect one can become the very means through which the unity, and even more the absolute indivisibility, of God or Nature can be intuitively affirmed and embodied through one’s own essential existence.

5. The Third Kind of Knowledge


If the truth and adequacy of the common notions activate our intellectual capacity to rationally control our emotions and causally determine the bodies around us to enter into greater and stronger compositions, thereby liberating us into the absolute necessity of God’s natural and lawful order, then it is the intuition, the intuitive knowledge and embodiment, of this truth that will make us eternally wise and blessed. Blessedness consists in loving God with the love whereby he loves himself (VP36), and to intellectually love God not only gives us a blessed existence, it also gives us eternal joy. With the third kind of knowledge, knowledge is solely sub specie aeternitatis.

5a. Intuition

Spinoza defines the third kind of knowledge as a “kind of knowing that proceeds from an adequate idea of the formal essence of certain attributes of God to the adequate knowledge of the [formal] essence of things” (IIP40S2). The second kind of knowledge supplies us with the adequate idea that all singular things must be unified into something immediately caused by God (the infinite in kind and immediate modes) and that all singular things are modes of certain attributes of God (thought and extension). With the third kind of knowledge we can know an attribute not merely through a common notion, but as the essential existence itself of God’s indivisible infinity and eternal necessity. The third kind of knowledge is the knowledge that knows the essence of each and every thing as a way that God causes himself to exist. Knowing a singular thing without the explicit mediation of knowing what it composes into or is as a part of an immediate causal order and connection, is to know it intuitively as simply being a way God eternally and infinitely exists. Intuition is intellectual knowledge taken beyond the immediacy of the infinite in kind. Intuition is more immediate than immediacy; it is affirmative identification, the absolutely self-reflexive identification and knowledge of God and his modes through oneself. Intuition is the absolute affirmation of the natural and necessary eternity of God’s attributes as essentially being the singular things he expresses of himself. Intuition is the knowledge that all things are one thing that God is, that all his attributes are the modes with which he modifies himself. We can know through the essence of singular things that the certain attributes they modify are also the indivisibility of all of God’s attributes, insofar as “no attribute of substance can be truly conceived from which it follows that substance can be divided” (IP12). Intuition is what allows us to know not merely the attributes we modify, but to know both ourselves as the attributes we modify and all the attributes themselves as being the essential existence of all things that is God. In other words, intuition allows us to know all the attributes as the ways God is one indivisible and absolutely immanent entity. Through an intuition of God’s essence one can know the infinity and eternity of one’s own mind and body. To shift one’s perspective to that of God’s is to conceive of the eternal aspect of all things and to intuitively see oneself through God’s absolute perfection and power.

5b. Love and Blessedness


For Spinoza, to intuit God is to love God. The intuition of God is the intellectual love of his essential existence, with love being that power of intuition that makes intellection (the exercise of the intellect) more immediate than the immediacy known through the common notions of the second kind of knowledge. Love is defined, on the one hand, as “joy with the accompanying idea of an external cause” (IIIP13S), but, on the other hand, with the intellectual love of God the idea of the cause of such joy is more an internal cause than an external one because through the third kind of knowledge one knows absolutely that God constitutes one’s own essential existence. In a finite sense, joy is an increase in perfection, but the joy involved in the intellectual love of God is almost an identification of one’s love with God’s very absolute perfection, or infinite self-love. God’s absolute self-love is his indivisibly infinite and eternal self-causal power to essentially exist as all things. The third kind of knowledge, intuitive knowledge, loves this self-love in the way that it loves itself. The intellectual love of God is the absolute knowledge of all the ways one can know God and all the ways God knows himself as an infinity of ways he conceives and loves his own truth for all eternity. It is with the aid of the affective power of reason that our liberation into true necessity is affirmed even more intensely as we come to embody the freedom to conceive of the universe from its own eternally living and infinitely natural perspective of absolute perfection, power, and reality.

The third kind of knowledge endows us with a kind of immortality. It is not that we exist in our perceived or imagined finite form for all eternity, because all finite bodies and the ideas and affections of them decompose, but that we exist eternally by shifting our perspective and our knowledge to that of the infinity and eternity of God’s indivisibly physical self-conception and self-knowledge (VP29). Spinoza writes, “Insofar as our mind knows itself and the body under a species of eternity, it necessarily has knowledge of God, and knows that it is in God and is conceived through God” (VP30). To intuit God through an intellectual love of his essential existence, and thereby conceive all things from his eternal perspective, is to render our adequate knowledge and rational freedom truly divine. Blessedness is the virtue, rarity, excellence, and power of our absolute knowledge of God’s absolute knowledge. Absolute knowledge is thus divine wisdom.

6. References and Further Reading

All passages from the texts of Spinoza are taken from the translations appearing in The Collected Works of Spinoza. Vol. I. Edited and translated by Edwin Curley. (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1985). Passages from the Ethics are cited according to Book (I - V), Definition (D), Axiom (A), Proposition (P), Corollary (C), and Scholium (S). For example, (IVP13S) refers to Ethics, Book IV, Proposition 13, Scholium. Passages from the Treatise on the Emendation of the Intellect are cited according to paragraph number. For example, (TdIE 35) refers to Treatise on the Emendation of the Intellect, paragraph 35.

  • Curley, Edwin, “Experience in Spinoza’s Theory of Knowledge” in Spinoza: A Collection of Critical Essays, ed. Marjorie Grene, (Garden City, NY: Doubleday/Anchor Press, 1973), 25-59.
  • Curley, Edwin, Filippo Magnini, and W. N. A Klever (eds). Spinoza’s Epistemology, vol.2 of Studia Spinozana. (Hanover: Walther & Walther Verlag, 1986).
  • De Dijn, Herman. Spinoza: The Way to Wisdom. (West Lafayette, IN: Purdue University Press, 1996).
  • Deleuze, Gilles. Spinoza: Practical Philosophy. (San Francisco: City Lights Books, 1988).
  • Della Rocca, Michael. Representation and the Mind-Body Problem in Spinoza. (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1996).
  • Floistad, Guttorm, “Spinoza’s Theory of Knowledge in the Ethics” in Spinoza: A Collection of Critical Essays, ed. Marjorie Grene, (Garden City, NY: Doubleday/Anchor Press, 1973), 101-127.
  • Garret, Don, “Spinoza,” in A Companion to Epistemology, ed. Ernest Sosa and Jonathan Dancy, (Oxford: Basil Blackwell, 1992), 488-490.
  • Garrett, Don, “Representation and Consciousness in Spinoza’s Naturalistic Theory of the Imagination” in Interpreting Spinoza: Critical Essays, ed. Charlie Huenemann, (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2008), 4-25.
  • Huenemann, Charlie, “Epistemic Autonomy in Spinoza,” in Interpreting Spinoza: Critical Essays, ed. Charlie Huenemann, (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2008), 94-110.
  • Lloyd, Genevieve, Part of Nature: Self-Knowledge in Spinoza's Ethics. (Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press, 1994).
  • Mark, Thomas Carson. Spinoza's Theory of Truth. (New York: Columbia University Press, 1972).
  • Parkinson, G. H. R., Spinoza’s Theory of Knowledge. (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1954).
  • Parkinson, G. H. R., “Language and Knowledge in Spinoza” in Spinoza: A Collection of Critical Essays, ed. Marjorie Grene, (Garden City, NY: Doubleday/Anchor Press, 1973), 73-100.
  • Wilson, Margaret D., “Spinoza’s Theory of Knowledge” in The Cambridge Companion to Spinoza, ed. Don Garrett, (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996), 89-141.

Author Information

Nels Dockstader
The University of Western Ontario

Louise-Françoise de la Baume Le Blanc, marquise de La Vallière (1644—1710)

lavalliereA mistress of Louis XIV, who became a Carmelite nun, Mademoiselle de la Vallière has long fascinated historians and novelists by her picaresque life.  But only recently has the philosophical dimension of that life received attention.  During her years as royal mistress, La Vallière studied the works of Aristotle and Descartes in the literary salons of Paris.  After her religious conversion under the direction of Bossuet, she composed a treatise dealing with the mercy of God.  In this work and in her correspondence, La Vallière revealed her skill as a moraliste, a critic of the contradictions and subterfuges of the human psyche.  Her writings focus in particular on virtue theory.  La Vallière privileges the theological virtues of faith, hope, and charity; she criticizes the unredeemed cardinal virtues as masks of human pride.  As a social critic, La Vallière demonstrates how the culture of the court has produced counterfeits of the theological virtues. Her writings insist on the necessary presence of grace for the emergence of authentic virtue, as well as express skepticism on the capacity of nature alone to cultivate virtue.  Rather than being abolished, the human passions undergo their own conversion in the grace-induced dynamic of repentance and reform.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Works
  3. Moral Philosophy
    1. Virtue Theory
    2. Nature and Grace
    3. Theory of Passions
  4. Reception and Interpretation
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Biography

On August 6, 1644, Louise-Françoise de la Baume Le Blanc de laVallière was born into an aristocratic family in Tours.  Both parents claimed a distinguished lineage.  Her father, Laurent, Seigneur de la Vallière, descended from a family noted for its military service to the French crown.  At the time of his daughter’s birth, he held the post of governor of the royal chateau of Amboise.  Descended from a noblesse de robe family known for its legal service to the throne, her mother, Françoise Le Prévost, was the widow of a prominent member of the parliament in Paris.  After the death of Louise-Françoise’s father in 1651, Jacques de Courtavel, marquis de Saint Rémy, married her newly widowed mother.  In the recurrent struggles between the absolutist French monarchy and the restive aristocracy attempting to maintain its ancient privileges, the members of the La Vallière family sided with the royalist cause.

Mademoiselle de la Vallière was raised in a militantly Catholic provincial aristocracy.  Ecclesiastical vocations were common in her immediate family.  Uncle Gilles was bishop of Nantes; Uncle Jacques was a Jesuit priest; Aunts Élisabeth and Charlotte were Ursuline nuns.  La Vallière’s formal education was primarily literary.  Under the tutelage of her Urusuline aunts, the young Louis-Françoise studied grammar, reading, composition, and public speaking.  In 1655, she moved to the chateau of Blois for her adolescent education.  The official residence of Gaston, duc d’Orléans, the brother of Louis XIII, Blois permitted La Vallière to join the Orléans daughters in the courses conducted by the house chaplain, Abbé de Rancé, a cultured theologian who would later emerge as one of France’s leading monastic reformers.  In this royal curriculum, La Vallière studied the arts of painting, music, etiquette, and equitation as well as continuing her literary studies.  Under the guidance of Rancé, she was introduced to the neo-Aristotelian elements of the catechesis mandated by the Council of Trent.

Closely tied to the royal family, La Vallière made her official debut at court in 1661 when she was appointed a lady-in-waiting to Henriette d’Angleterre, the wife of Louis, duc d’Orléans.  At the moment of her arrival, court gossips were criticizing the excessive amount of private time Louis XIV was spending with his beautiful sister-in-law.  Royal counselors encouraged the king to deflect the rumors of an incestuous affair by appearing to express romantic interest in the new member of Henriette’s entourage, La Vallière.  The royal secretary Dangeau ghostwrote a series of romantic letters allegedly written by Louis XIV and La Vallière; other courtiers arranged late-night meetings between the king and the lady-in-waiting that projected the air of a romantic tryst.  The ruse quickly became fact as Louis XIV become infatuated with the cultured new courtier.  La Vallière was recognized as the official royal mistress and bore the king four children: Charles (1663-65), Philippe (1665-66), Marie Anne de Bourbon (1666-1739), and Louis de Bourbon (1667-83).  The king later legitimized his two surviving children and ennobled them under the respective titles Mademoiselle de Blois and Comte de Vermandois.

During her years as royal mistress, La Vallière continued to pursue her artistic and literary interests.  She attended performances of Racine and Molière, read the period’s fashionable novels, and took courses in painting at the Académie Royale.  La Vallière showed a predilection for philosophical issues.  In salon circles, she was known for her well-informed discussions on Aristotle’s Nicomachean Ethics and Descartes’s Discourse on Method.  Her circle of close intellectual friends was dominated by thinkers of a libertine tendency, notably Benserade and Lauzun.

In 1667, Louis XIV elevated La Vallière’s social status further by granting her the title of Duchesse de Vaujours, accompanied by the substantial estate at Vaujours.  But 1667 also marked the end of La Vallière’s ascendancy with the emergence of a rival, Madame de Montespan, who would ultimately displace La Vallière in the affection of the monarch and become the principal royal mistress.

Long troubled by scruples over her adulterous affair, La Vallière underwent a religious crisis in 1670.  After recovering from a serious illness, possibly smallpox, she made a confession of her sins and returned to the regular practice of the Catholic faith.  Under the direction of the court preacher Bossuet, La Vallière abandoned the social activities of the court and began to lead a penitential life of prayer and mortification.  Renouncing her former libertine allies, La Vallière allied herself to the parti dévot, a group of pious lay courtiers who opposed the moral decadence of the court.  In her new spiritual reading, La Vallière discovered the works of the Catholic Counter-Reformation, in particular Saint Teresa of Avila’s Path of Perfection, with its ascetical and mystical conception of virtue and beatitude.  Under the influence of Bossuet in 1671, La Vallière wrote a theological work, Reflections on the Mercy of God, which paralleled the divine attribute of mercy with the virtues proper to the repentant sinner.

The sudden conversion of a Versailles courtesan turned La Vallière into a religious celebrity but humiliated Louis XIV, whose sexual infidelities and religious hypocrisy had become public knowledge.  Only in 1674 did the monarch permit his former mistress to pursue her vocation as a nun.  On April 19, 1674, La Vallière entered the Carmelite convent in Paris, where she would henceforth be known as Soeur Louise de la Miséricorde.  Preaching to a convent packed by the capital’s religious elite, Bishop Jean-Louis de Fromentière of Aires denounced the immorality of the court at Versailles; according to the bishop, La Vallière’s entry into the austerity of Carmel amounted to a moral miracle.  On June 4, 1675, Soeur Louise pronounced her vows as a Carmelite nun.  Queen Marie-Thérèse, the wife of Louis XIV, personally headed the congregation and witnessed the apotheosis of the former courtesan who had defied Versailles.  Preaching at the ceremony of profession, Bossuet pointedly drew the lesson that even the world’s most powerful persons must repent of their sins and cease their abuses of power.

During her secluded decades in the convent, Soeur Louise de la Miséricorde lived an exemplary life as a Carmelite nun, noted for the rigor of her penitential practices.  She did, however, continue the correspondence she had begun during her conversion with the lay leader of the parti dévot, Maréchal de Bellefonds.  Her letters show the clear spiritual influence of the école française by their recurrent stress on abandonment to divine providence and on annihilation of the self.  They also contain an ongoing critique of the immorality, violent ambition, and practical atheism she had witnessed in her court years.  In the convent parlor, Soeur Louise occasionally received acquaintances from her previous life: Rancé, Bossuet, Queen Marie-Thérèse, even her old rival, Madame de Montespan, who had also fallen from her former status as royal mistress.

Mademoiselle de la Vallière died on June 6, 1710.

2. Works

La Vallière left two principal works to posterity: the treatise Reflections on the Mercy of God and her spiritual correspondence with the Maréchal de Bellefonds.  The erratic history of the commentary and publication of these two works indicate how easily the philosophical reflection of women authors has been erased from the canon.

In 1671 in the immediate aftermath of her religious conversion, La Vallière composed Reflections on the Mercy of God.  A semi-autobiographical work, this treatise studies the mercy of God for sinners, especially for courtesans who have renounced their sexual sins and sought a new penitential life in exile from the excesses of the court.  The author appeals to feminine figures of repentance and sanctity in the New Testament, notably Saint Mary Magdalene, as paradigms of the conversion which La Vallière has undergone.  The work studies how faith, hope, charity, and other theological virtues function in the life of those led to authentic moral reformation through the action of grace.  Conversely, it dissects the false variants of faith, hope, and charity produced by the court culture of ambition and avarice.  The influence of the theology of Bossuet, her spiritual director during the crisis of conversion, is apparent in the text, although the simple, limpid prose style differs markedly from the more rhetorical and periodic style of Bossuet himself.

The first print edition of Reflections on the Mercy of God appeared anonymously in 1680.  A popular work of piety, the book had undergone ten editions by the beginning of the eighteenth century.  La Vallière was always considered the author of the book, which was clearly written in her style and full of allusions to her life as a courtesan.  Many editions published in her lifetime, such as the Frankfurt and Brussels editions in 1683, explicitly named her as the author, with no demurral from Soeur Louise or her associates.  In the nineteenth-century, literary critics noted that the later editions of Reflections used a longer and somewhat more elegant version of the text than had the earlier editions.  In 1852, Damas-Hinard claimed that the true author of the book was Bossuet, for whom La Vallière had only served as an amanuensis, but other critics dismissed the claim on the grounds of stylistic differences with Bossuet’s others’ works and of the clearly gendered autobiographical experiences the author had incorporated into the work. Although Bossuet had incontestably influenced the theological opinions of La Vallière and a later editor had imposed some stylistic alterations, the text remained substantially La Vallière’s own.

In 1928, the literary critic Marcel Langlois made a more startling claim: that La Vallière had not written the book at all.  Langlois based this claim on the argument that the rationalist tone of the work indicated that it was written by a man rather than by a woman.  Furthermore, no woman of the period could have possessed the philosophical and theological culture which the author clearly displays.  “We observe that the author reads Holy Scripture in Latin and that he makes references to Aristotle and Descartes.  A careful look at the text indicates that there is no trace of a feminine style.  We know that Mademoiselle de la Vallière was very depressed at this time and that she was a shy person all her life.  On the contrary, on every page, we hear the voice of a man, of a director of conscience.”  Led by Jean-Baptiste Eriau, other literary critics immediately refuted Langlois’s claim and reattributed the authorship of the work to La Vallière.  They pointed out that La Vallière was renowned precisely for her command of Aristotle and Descartes in salon debates and that many cultured laywomen of the period possessed bilingual Latin-French psalters and New Testaments.  The recent textual analyses by Petitfils (1990) and Huertas (1998) have reconfirmed the duchess’s authorship of Reflections on the Mercy of God.

La Vallière’s other extant work, her correspondence with the Maréchal de Bellefonds, underwent a similarly tangled publication history.  The first edition of her letters (1767) was so full of errors, omissions, and interpellations as to be corrupt.  Her alleged memoirs (1829) were a fabrication.  Only Pierre Clément’s two-volume edition of her works in 1860 provided the first reliable publication of her letters to Bellefonds.  Her correspondence explores the ascetical and mystical sentiments of the soul and continues the critique of the moral corruption to which the courtier is prone.

3. Moral Philosophy

The primary philosophical interest in the works of La Vallière resides in her treatment of virtue in Reflections on the Mercy of God.  She rejects the claims of pagan antiquity to have possessed authentic moral virtues, exalts the theological virtues, and criticizes the moral values of the court as a distortion of the theological virtues, altered to suit ambitious self-interest.  Grace, rather than human merit, emerges as the cause of authentic virtue. Instead of minimizing the passions as a hindrance to the cultivation of virtue, La Vallière esteems the human emotions, especially the passion of love, as central to the moral personality of the human agent redeemed by grace.

3a. Virtue Theory

In Reflections on the Mercy of God, La Vallière develops her theory of the theological virtues of faith, hope, and charity.  The treatise also diagnoses the opponents and the distortions of the theological virtues in the aristocratic society of the period.

Faith emerges as more than an assent to the truths revealed by God and proposed by the teaching authority of the Catholic Church; it entails a militant opposition to the world.  This firmness of faith brooks no compromise with worldly allurements.  “O my God, give me…a firm faith that makes me believe in Your words and makes me remember, when the world wants me to follow it, that we cannot serve two masters” (RMD no.4).  When authentic, this militant faith comports two other virtues: humility and enlightenment.  The humility of faith closely ties the believer to the imitation of Jesus crucified, the opposite of conformity to the world’s concept of glory.  A properly enlightened faith continually reminds the believer of the radical superiority of eternal God over the fleeting world in terms of glory.

In her analysis of faith, La Vallière diagnoses the enemies of faith in the cultured society of her age.  Three positions in particular earn her rebuke: conventionalism, libertinism, and rationalism.  Religious conventionalism has reduced to faith a matter of external ritual, shorn of interior moral conversion.  “These are persons who, in the midst of shadows that blind them, refuse to be enlightened by the light of these theological truths.  We could say that a soul sunk within the world, without prayer, without reflection, and without consulting God on questions of conduct, is similar to a ship with neither captain nor rudder in the midst of a storm” (RMD no. 22).  For the conventional, faith is a simple matter of social conformity.

Libertinism proposes a more explicit rejection of the virtue of faith.  Its posture is marked by contempt for the very enterprise of religion.  “I will flee with horror all those evil people who parade their libertinism, who brag about their vices, and who, as Scripture says, never consider God in their conduct….These militant libertines can only help to foster irreligion, to destroy the purest reputation, to give us an exaggerated sense of self-worth that merits Your abandonment of us, to honor evil and those who commit it” (RMD no. 15).  The libertinism censured in this passage is clearly that of the courtier.  The destruction of reputation by malicious gossip and the vanity of proximity to power are the vices of the libertine courtier who holds traditional religion and its allied virtue of humility in contempt.

More subtle than libertinism, rationalism erodes faith by subjecting what lies beyond human reason to the judgment of fallible human reason.  La Vallière defends the orthodox faith of those who resist the rationalist attacks on the supernatural.  “I speak of those who are astonished to learn that there are some people who believe the histories of Alexander and Caesar but who doubt the history of Jesus Christ…who believe the truth of the gospel preached by a dozen poor preachers and of the establishment of His Church founded on an infinite number of miracles…who believe that so many mysteries incomprehensible to the human mind are pure effects of the omnipotence of Jesus Christ and of His infinite love toward His creatures” (RMD no.22).  This critique of rationalism defends the supernatural nature of the object of Christian faith by refusing to remove the miraculous and the mysterious from the content of faith.  Tellingly, it attacks historical-critical analysis of the Scriptures, which would undercut the historical veracity of the life of Christ.  In this particular line of attack, La Vallière is clearly influenced by her spiritual director Bossuet, who in the 1670s combated the historical-critical exegesis of Richard Simon, an Oratorian scholar who challenged the traditional thesis of the Mosaic authorship of the entire Pentateuch, the five opening books of the Bible.

In her treatment of hope, La Vallière similarly distinguishes between the authentic virtue and its counterfeits in the milieu of the court.  True hope emerges as trust in the redemptive power of God. “I implore you, Lord, by the merit of this precious blood that flows from Your sacred wounds that You offer to the eternal Father as the price of my redemption, a true confidence in Your mercies” (RMD no.7).  Hope can easily deteriorate into presumption when the sinner forgets divine justice and uses divine mercy as an excuse to delay repentance and moral reform.  “If You are a God full of compassion for sinners who return to You with all their hearts with hope in Your mercy, You are a terrifying God toward those who trust in You only to multiply their own offenses and who, having tasted the sweetness of your graces, only mock and hold them in contempt” (RMD no. 7).

In court society, theological hope has been eclipsed by the predominance of a purely secular hope for political and economic advancement.  The egocentric hopes of ambition have crowded out the authentic hope of eternal life in Christ.  “May this solid hope, showing me the nothingness and fragility of everything we call here below position, fortune, wealth, and grandeur, make me no longer esteem them as most people esteem them.  They act as if no other happiness and no other life exist after this one” (RMD no.16).  The danger of such a careerist hope is that it ignores rather than explicitly opposes the theological hope of immortality.  In such a purely terrestrial version of hope, the promise of eternity simply vanishes from concern.

Like other Christian writers, La Vallière accords primacy to the virtue of charity among the theological virtues.  Authentic charity is tempered by courage, the willingness to accept the world’s mockery out of fidelity to God.  “Create a new heart in me: a humble, firm, constant, and courageous heart, free from the world and its creatures─a truly Christian heart, whereby I will love You when I must sacrifice my life and fortune in witness to Your name and pay homage to the folly of the cross at the heart of a country and of a nation that consider it a scandal” (RMD no.11).  La Vallière’s concept of charity is not one of simple affection toward God and neighbor; it is contextualized as the love of God manifested in a society whose pride and self-esteem hold the cross, the central symbol of God’s love, in contempt.

The opposition to authentic charity is not generic hatred or indifference; it is specifically the contempt of others manifest by an ambitious aristocracy.  The malicious gossip of the courtier and of the salonnière is a prominent symptom of the contempt by which the neighbor is humiliated in court society.  “We only prize these gross sarcastic remarks and personal attacks, unworthy even for a pagan.  We consider as of no consequence words which attack the very soul of our neighbors, which mockingly dissect their faults and which make them appear ridiculous….We dismiss as nothing the destruction of their happiness and reputation as long as we do it with an entertaining laugh” (RMD no.17).  In this passage, the aristocratic society of wit is unmasked as the determined enemy of authentic charity, which finds its apotheosis in the humble sacrifice of the cross.

3b. Nature and Grace

For La Vallière, nature itself cannot cause moral virtue to exist, since nature exists in a state of postlapsarian corruption.  All moral virtue, and not only the theological virtues, requires God’s grace to emerge and mature.

Reflections on the Mercy of God argues that traditional moral virtues, even the cardinal virtues, are only masks for various vices.  The alleged virtue of prudence, for example, dissembles the human desire for security.  “God did not take flesh and die for us in order to grant our salvation through a comfortable life, according to the prudence of the sense and of the flesh….These moral virtues have no merit whatsoever before You if they are not animated by the merits and virtues of Jesus Christ” (RMD no.6).  Freed from the ingrained self-centeredness of human nature, authentic moral virtues constitute variations of the theological virtues, which are in turn the unmerited gift of God’s grace rather than products of human initiative.

This disjunction between apparent natural virtue and authentic supernatural virtue extends to the realm of intellectual virtue.  La Vallière sharply opposes the natural wisdom of the world, prized by philosophers, to the wisdom of the cross, revealed only by divine grace.  “Give me…less human and natural lights, out of fear that by following them rather than the lights of Your grace, I would lose myself.  By following them, instead of being a humble Christian, my self-love would turn me into a socialite philosopher, filled more with false maxims than with the science of the cross….This is the wisdom God hides from the haughty and reveals to the humble.  This is the wisdom which overturns prudence and which follows the movements of grace from Jesus Christ” (RMD no.5).  Rather than building on the wisdom of the world, the grace-inspired wisdom of the cross reveals the falsehood of the world’s account of what is true and valuable.  In the exercises of the intellect as in those of the will, only grace can permit the human agent to embrace actual, rather than counterfeit, goods.

3c. Theory of Passions

Whereas other moral philosophers of the period discounted or dismissed the passions in their account of the moral life, La Vallière places a positive value upon them in her ethical theory. Rather than being suppressed, the human passions should be presented to God for transformation in the itinerary of religious and moral conversion.  “Is it right that having found everything possible to satisfy my passions, which only had idols for their object, I find it difficult or impossible when I have to resurrect the passions and love You with all my heart?” (RMD no.12)  Just as the intellect and will must be transformed by grace through the acquisition of authentic wisdom and moral virtue, the emotions must be transformed by God into new sentiments of reverence and devotion.  It is love above all that must be altered from the self-centered quest for human esteem into the self-sacrificial adoration of God’s very self.

Prayerful meditation constitutes the privileged locus for the human agent to undergo this grace-inspired emotional transformation.  Rather than abolishing the human quest for pleasure, contemplation substitutes spiritual pleasure for the physical pleasures once sought by the sinful.  “There [in meditation] You make us find a holy and sovereign pleasure to love You above all things and to come often to speak to You, not only as our father and our God, but as the most tender friend we could ever have.  We come to lament before You about all of these passions that tyrannize us, about all these worries that upset us, and about all this sadness that exhausts us.  In the sweet exchange of prayer, we may show You the bottom of our hearts” (RMD no.19).  In this dialogical form of meditation, the meditant may present his or her emotional distresses before God for healing, just as he or she presents sins for forgiveness.  The mature fruit of such meditation is an unconditional love for God that slowly integrates once disordered passions into authentic charity for one’s neighbor.

4. Reception and Interpretation

The reception of the writings of Mademoiselle de La Vallière roughly follows three distinct phases: the devotional, the literary, and the philosophical.  In the late seventeenth, eighteenth, and early nineteenth centuries, La Vallière’s Reflections on the Mercy of God constituted a staple of French Catholic devotional literature.  Many commentators celebrated her as the French Magdalene and compared her to earlier examples of courtesans who had become public penitents, such as Saint Mary of Alexandria.  Madame de Genlis’s popular biography of La Vallière (1818) reflects this devotional image of the royal mistress who miraculously became a cloistered nun.

In the late nineteenth and early twentieth centuries, commentators focused more on the literary dimensions of La Vallière.  Illustrated by the works of Cornut (1857), Langlois (1932), and Eriau (1961), the protracted quarrel over the authorship of Reflections on the Mercy of God reflects this literary approach.  Petitfils (1990) has continued this scholarly concern for textual questions concerning La Vallière.

Recently, in such commentaries as those of Huertas (1998) and of Conley (2002), a greater emphasis has been given to the intellectual formation and philosophical theories of La Vallière.  Recent interest in virtue theory of moral philosophy and the development of a more sectarian ethics in recent Christian moral theology has highlighted the interest of La Vallière’s thesis that authentic moral and intellectual virtue is grounded in grace rather than in nature.  The recent feminist expansion of the canon of humanities has also underscored the claims of La Vallière to philosophical status, given her study of canonical philosophers such as Aristotle and Descartes, and also given her contributions to moral psychology through her treatise and correspondence.

5. References and Further Reading

All French to English translations above are by the author of this article.

a. Primary Sources

  • La Vallière, Françoise-Louise de la Baume Le Blanc, duchesse de. Réfléxions sur la Miséricorde de Dieu, suivies de ses lettres et des sermons pour sa vêture et sa profession, par messieurs d’Aires et de Condom, 2 vols., ed. Pierre Clément. Paris: J. Techner, 1860.
    • Despite its dated scholarship, Clément’s edition constitutes the most extensive print collection of writings by and concerning La Vallière.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Conley, John. The Suspicion of Virtue: Women Philosophers in Neoclassical France. Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 2002), 97-123.
    • The chapter studies the moral and social philosophy of La Vallière.
  • Conley, John. “Suppressing Women Philosophers: The Case of the Early Modern Canon,” Early Modern Women: An Interdisciplinary Journal 2006 1: 99-114.
    • The article examines the denial of attribution of authorship to La Vallière and other women philosophers of the period.
  • Cornut, Romain. Les Réflexions de Madame de la Vallière répentante écrite par elle-même et corrigées par Bossuet, 2nd ed. Paris: Didier, 1857.
    • Although Cornut exaggerates the role of Bossuet in the writing of Reflections, the degree and nature of Bossuet’s influence on La Vallière remains a topic of scholarly dispute.
  • Eriau, Jean-Baptiste. La Madeleine française: Louise de la Vallière dans sa famille, à la cour, au Carmel. Paris: Nouvelles éditions latines, 1961.
    • Eriau refutes Langlois’s misattribution of authorship of Reflections and restores the rightful attribution to La Vallière.
  • Genlis, Stéphanie, comtesse de. La Duchesse de la Vallière. Paris: Maradan, 1818.
    • This romanticized biography of La Vallière reflects the image of the repentant courtesan which had captivated the French Catholic public.
  • Huertas, Monique de. Louise de la Vallière: De Versailles au Carmel. Paris:Pygmalion/Watelet, 1998.
    • This biography of La Vallière discusses her participation in the philosophical salons of the period.
  • Langlois, Marcel. La conversion de Mlle de la Vallière et l’auteur véritable des Réflexions.  Paris: Plon, 1932.
    • Langlois’s denial of La Vallière’s authorship of Reflections was immediately refuted by other literary critics.
  • Petitfils, Jean-Christian. Louise de la Vallière. Paris: Perrin, 1990.
    • Petifils’s scholarly biography contains a critical edition of an early version of La Vallière’s Reflections on the Mercy of God.

Author Information

John J. Conley
Loyola University in Maryland
U. S. A.

Anne-Thérèse Marguenat de Courcelles, marquise de Lambert (1647—1733)

LambertA prominent salonnière in the France of Louis XIV and the Regency, Madame de Lambert authored numerous essays dealing with philosophical issues.  Her most famous works, twin sets of instructions to her son and daughter, analyze the virtues to be cultivated by each gender in the aristocracy.  Men pursue glory while women focus on humility.  During the literary querelle de la femme, Lambert defends the dignity of women against misogynist stereotypes advanced by opponents of gender equality.  In her political writings, she criticizes the vices typical of the hierarchical society of the period, especially the unequal distribution of material goods.  The era’s distortion of friendship and mistreatment of the elderly also receive critical scrutiny.  Her religious philosophy leans toward the God of deism: a Supreme Being who should be honored for the works of creation but whose attributes do not transcend the categories of human reason.  Several works in aesthetics treat the subjective problem of taste and sensibility.  Throughout her writings, Lambert manifests her allegiance to a Cartesian understanding of the nature of philosophical analysis.  The French Enlightenment recognized the philosophical value of her works, most of which were published posthumously.  Fontenelle, Montesquieu, and Voltaire are the most prominent of the Enlightenment thinkers who lauded the philosophical acumen of Lambert.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Works
  3. Philosophical Themes
    1. Virtue Theory
    2. Gender and Dignity
    3. Ethics of Love
    4. Social Criticism
    5. Religious Philosophy
    6. Aesthetics
    7. Cartesianism
  4. Reception and Interpretation
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Biography

On September 25, 1647, Anne-Thérèse Marguenat de Courcelles was born in Paris to a provincial aristocratic family from the region of Troyes.  Both the paternal and maternal sides of the family had acquired substantial wealth from commercial transactions.  An administrator in the Chambre des Comptes, her father Étienne died on May 22, 1650.  Her mother Monique Passart then secretly married François Le Coigneux, seigneur de la Roche Turpin et de Bachaumont.  Anne-Thérèse received formal instruction at the convent of the Annonciades in Meulan, but it was her stepfather who cultivated the young Ann-Thérèse’s philosophical opinions.  A respected poet and memorialist, Bachamount introduced his stepdaughter to the neo-Epicurean philosophy he espoused in his writings.  He guided her study of the classics and helped to shape her limpid writing style in French.

On February 22, 1666, Anne-Thérèse married Henri de Lambert, marquis de Saint-Bris en Auxerrois, baron de Chitry et Augy.  Henceforth, she will be addressed as Marquise de Lambert or simply Madame de Lambert.  Descended from a provincial aristocratic family in Perigord, Henri de Lambert was a military officer who at the time of the marriage served as the captain of the First Company of the Royal Regiment of the Cavalry.  The marriage produced four children, one of whom died shortly after birth.

On June 12, 1684, Henri de Lambert reached the pinnacle of his political career when he was named governor of the duchy of Luxembourg.    He died suddenly on August 1, 1686.  His death was quickly followed by the death of their eleven-year old daughter, Monique.  The bereaved Madame de Lambert faced imminent impoverishment since she was locked in a lawsuit with her mother over the estate of her deceased father.  Estimated at over five-hundred thousand pounds in worth, the estate had been left entirely to Madame de Lambert’s mother by virtue of a will signed by her father.  The bitter adjudication of the will and the conflicting claims of mother and daughter did not end even with the mother’s death in 1692.  A royal pension permitted Madame de Lambert to survive and her two remaining children to pursue their education until the juridical controversy was settled largely in Lambert’s favor in the late 1690s.

In 1698 an economically secure Madame de Lambert opened her new residence in the Hôtel de Nevers in Paris.  Starting in 1710, she conducted a salon in the drawing room of her residence; it soon became the most intellectually distinguished salon in the capital.  She became noted for her contrasting “Tuesday” and “Wednesday” salons.  Tuesdays were devoted to men and women of letters.  Participants were expected to read aloud their works in progress and to debate the literary issues of the moment.  Wednesdays were devoted to more social receptions for the aristocracy living in the capital.

Prominent salon members included the philosophers Fontenelle and Montesquieu, the dramatist Marivaux, the classicist Anne Dacier, the poet Catherine Bernard, the theologian Fénelon, the tale-writer Marie-Catherine d’Aulnoy, and the mathematician Dortous de Mairan.  The intellectual distinction of Lambert’s salon earned it the sobriquet of bureau d’esprit (the business office of wit.)  The salon also earned a reputation as a place of literary intrigue, especially for lobbying for positions in the prestigious Académie française.  Lambert herself was credited with successfully lobbying for the appointment of Montesquieu from her “antechamber to the Académie.”  Although Lambert banned political and religious discussions from the salon sessions, her salon enjoyed a mildly libertine reputation.  She defended Montesquieu’s controversial Persian Letters, censured for its alleged religious skepticism, and supported Antoine Houdar de la Motte’s attacks on the neoclassical veneration of Homer and of the three unities in drama.

In the salon Madame Lambert shared her own writings with her guests.  Her early works were moral exhortations to her son and daughter respectively as they entered adulthood.  Later writings dealt with friendship, old age, and aesthetics.  Her writings were usually written in the form of a brief essay, modeled after her beloved Montaigne, and often incorporated the miniature literary genres then popular in the salons: maxim, literary portrait, literary dialogue, edifying tale.  Madame Lambert’s writings were written uniquely for diffusion in manuscript copies to members of her salon.  When a pirated edition of her Counsels of a Mother to her Son appeared in print in 1726, she vehemently protested and bought out what remained of the edition.  Publication of a book for public sale in the bookstalls of France was considered inappropriate for an aristocratic woman of the period; furthermore, the intimate details of family life revealed in these essays addressed to her children were not meant to be shared with the general public.  Despite Lambert’s protests, pirated print editions of her essays continued to sell briskly and quickly led to unauthorized translations into English.

Although her salon continued to flourish, the last years of Lambert’s life were darkened by the death of her daughter Monique-Thérèse in 1731 and by recurrent bouts of illness.  Madame de Lambert died on July 12, 1733.

2. Works

The works of Madame de Lambert attracted a broad European public from the time of the first pirated editions published during her lifetime: Counsels of a Mother to her Son (1726), New Reflections on Women (1727), and Counsels of a Mother to Her Editor (1728).  Her collected works enjoyed numerous editions throughout the eighteenth century (1747, 1748, 1750, 1751, 1758, 1761, 1766, 1774, 1785).  The English translation of her collected works enjoyed similar popularity in multiple editions (1749, 1756, 1769, 1770, 1781).  A German translation of the works appeared in 1750, a Spanish edition in 1781.

Most of Lambert’s extant works are written in the form of a brief essay, with occasional exercises in literary dialogue and literary portraiture.  The following works treat philosophical issues.  Counsels of a Mother to her Son analyzes the moral virtues an aristocratic man must develop; Counsels of a Mother to her Daughter examines the moral virtues essential for the aristocratic woman.  Treatise on Friendship studies the power and difficulty of ethical friendship.  Treatise on Old Age laments the neglect of the elderly in contemporary society.  Reflections on Wealth decries materialism.  Reflections on Taste and Discourse on the Delicacy of Mind and of Sentiment examine aesthetic judgment.  Psyche analyzes the nature of the human soul.  Dialogue between Alexander and Diogenes criticizes the false glory represented by warriors such as Alexander the Great.

The philosophical influences on Lambert are not difficult to identify.  Since her childhood, Lambert carefully noted striking phrases from her reading.  In many of her writings, she uses quotations to justify her argument.  Two groups of thinkers predominate.  The first are classical authors with a marked Stoic orientation: Plutarch, Seneca, Marcus Aurelius, and Cicero.  The second are contemporary French authors often considered moralistes, because of their exploration of moral psychology, especially the deceptions of the human mind.  Prominent in this second group are Montaigne, La Rochefoucauld, La Bruyère, Pascal, Fénelon and Saint-Evremond.  So frequent is Lambert’s use of quotation that some critics have dismissed her writings as a tissue of paraphrases.  But Lambert transforms her sources to accommodate her own concerns, notably her concern about the status of women.  Lambert cites Cicero’s dissertation on old age but her own essay contains considerations on the impoverishment of aging women that are absent in Cicero.  Similarly, the marquise admits the debt of her Counsels of a Mother to her Daughter to Fénelon’s Education of Girls but nowhere does Fénelon develop the argument for the philosophical education of women which Lambert pursues in her own text.

3. Philosophical Themes


Madame Lambert’s writings focus on philosophical themes that preoccupied the more intellectual Parisian salons of the period.  In her discussion of the virtues, she makes careful distinctions on the various types of moral virtue, with particular interest in the aristocratic virtue of glory.  Like other salonnières, she analyzes the gradations of love and constructs an apology for chaste, intellectual love between adults of the opposite sex.  Lambert’s interest in pedagogy springs from the conviction that formation in virtue constitutes the chief purpose of education.  Despite her loyalty to the French throne, she criticizes the social injustices of French society, especially its unequal distribution of material wealth, and condemns what she considers the major vices of her own social class.  Her philosophical reflections on art focus primarily on the subjective issue of aesthetic appreciation, notably taste and delicacy.  A practicing Catholic, she develops a religious philosophy more attuned to the emerging deism of the period.  God is the Supreme Being affirmed by rational reflection on the cosmos rather than the personal redeemer known through revelation and grace.  Relatively secondary, the virtues of religion are assimilated to the more generic moral virtues of moderation, prudence, and integrity.  Lambert’s works develop a gendered philosophy not only because they defend the dignity of women against the misogyny of the period, but because they treat such issues as friendship, education, and old age through the lens of gender differentiation.

a. Virtue Theory

Lambert’s intertwined theories of virtue and education emerge in her two most popular works, Counsels of a Mother to her Son and Counsels of a Mother to her Daughter.  In both works, Lambert exhorts her children to grow in virtue as they leave adolescence and begin the commitments of adulthood.  She praises the moral habits they have already acquired through their earlier formal education and advises them on the moral dispositions they must obtain in the future.  But the virtues central for men are not the same as those vital for women.  Like other men, especially those of the nobility destined for military service, her son must pursue glory and its associated public virtues.  Like other women, destined primarily for household duties, her daughter should cultivate the more hidden virtues clustered around humility.

For men, the acquisition of the virtue of glory constitutes their highest aspiration.  According to Lambert, society has rightly named military valor as the chief title to this virtue.  “The glory of heroes is the most brilliant.  True marks of honor and acclaim are attached to it.  Renown seems personally designed for these men.”  In pursuing such glory, men must refuse to limit their ambition through a constraining personal modesty.  In fact, such ambition is necessary for gentlemen pursuing glory as long as they refrain from unfair attacks on their enemies or rivals.  Lambert conceives the virtue of glory as central to political as well as personal masculine development.  Political order is founded on a social contract using the aspiration to glory as a guarantor of civic cohesion.  “Men found that it was necessary and useful for them to unite together for the sake of the common good.  They made laws to punish the evil.  They agreed among themselves what constituted the basic duties of society and attached the idea of glory to the proper practice of these duties.”

The pursuit of grandeur in the military and broader civic forum requires men to develop other social virtues.  Like other salonnières of the period, Lambert emphasizes the virtue of honesty (honnêteté), a personal integrity that permits the gentleman to witness the needs of others and to serve them without excessive preoccupation.  “If you want to be a perfectly honest man, consider disciplining your self-love and give it a good object.  Honesty consists in emptying oneself of focusing on one’s own rights and in respecting the rights of others.”  Unlike true glory, with its attendant concern for others, false glory encourages self-gratification and ignores the misery of the other.  “Why is it that in this infinite number of desires fabricated by voluptuousness and indulgence one never finds the desire to provide relief for the unfortunate?  Doesn’t simple humanity make one feel the need to aid one’s fellow humans?  Moral hearts feel more greatly the obligation to do good than they do the other necessities of life.”  For Lambert, the cultivation of this altruistic honesty naturally entails the pursuit of other similarly discreet social virtues: politeness, tact, delicacy, and wisdom. Such honesty preserves the gentleman from the typical moral vices of the courtier: envy and avarice.

Unlike men, women are not called to cultivate the social virtues proper to the political sphere; they should develop virtues more appropriate to the domestic sphere of the household.  “Women are not called to partake in visible and brilliant virtues; rather, they pursue simple and quiet virtues.”  Glory, the central virtue of men, has no role in the retired life of women.  “The virtues of women are difficult because glory does not help to practice them.  These virtues are hidden: living with oneself; limiting one’s government to one’s family; being simple, just, and modest.”  Among other virtues of self-effacement, women are called to pursue humility and temperance.  Like the opposite sex, women must cultivate the virtues of honesty and politeness, but their participation in the civic sphere remains more circumscribed than that assigned by Lambert to men.

Despite this limitation of female moral culture to the province of the household, Lambert argues that women must develop a substantial set of intellectual virtues.  She insists that women should maintain an intellectual curiosity that leads to a lifetime of learning.  “Curiosity is knowledge that has already begun; it will make one go faster and further in the path of truth.  It is a natural inclination which goes beyond formal instruction.  It must not be stopped by sloth or soft living.” The educational program commended by Lambert for her daughter indicates the substantial intellectual culture Lambert considers desirable for aristocratic women.  The program includes the study of Greek, Roman, and French history; the study of ethics through the writings of Cicero and Pliny; the study of literature, especially the tragedies of Corneille; and the study of Latin.  Lambert adds a Cartesian note to this ambitious neoclassical curriculum by her approval of the study of philosophy.  “[I commend] especially the new sort [of philosophy], if one is capable of it; it will cultivate precision in one’s mind, clarify one’s thoughts, and teach one to think correctly.”  This apology for serious intellectual, specifically philosophical, formation for women is allied to the critique of the neglect of women’s education with which she opens Counsels of a Mother to her Daughter.  “Throughout time we have neglected the education of women; we only paid attention to that of men.  We acted as if women were a different kind of species.  We abandoned them to themselves without any assistance and without the slightest consideration that they constitute half of the world.”

Despite this gendered differentiation in the treatment of the moral virtues, men and women are summoned to develop one virtue in common: the capacity to live by oneself and to rely on one’s own rational judgment.  This neo-Stoic ability to find interior rational peace is the key to mature happiness for both sexes.  Counsels of a Mother to her Son describes this virtue as “the happiness of knowing how to live with oneself, to find oneself with pleasure, to leave oneself with regret.”  In Counsels of a Mother to her Daughter, Lambert exhorts her daughter to “learn that the greatest science is to know how to be alone with yourself….Provide yourself with an interior place of retreat or asylum.  There you can always return to yourself and find yourself.”  In this contemplative self-possession, wherein the passions are subordinated to reason, both men and women discover the interior resources to combat the vicissitudes of existence, especially of reversal of fortune.

b. Gender and Dignity

In New Reflections On Women, Lambert provides an apology for the dignity and rights of women.  The essay criticizes the misogyny which has denied women a proper education.  “Can’t women say to men, ‘What right do you have to forbid us to study the sciences and fine arts?  Haven’t women who have devoted themselves to these disciplines produced both sublime and useful objects?’”  As contemporary examples of such success, the essay cites Madame de la Sablière, an astronomer, and the many recent women novelists.  Lambert laments the decline of the salons which had earlier contributed to the artistic and philosophical formation of women.  “In other times there were houses where it was permitted to speak and to think, where the Muses held company with the Graces….These houses were like the Banquet of Plato.”  The social constitution which reduces women to inferiors and denies them the possibility of scientific culture does not reflect nature or rights; it is simply a corporate act of violence by men to retain their supremacy and to maintain the domestic services of women without appropriate compensation.  “By force rather than by natural right, men have usurped authority over women.”  The period’s art, notably Molière’s parody of the précieuses in Women Scholars, conspires to persuade women that their legal subjection and exclusion from serious education is a product of nature rather than of culpable oppression.

Despite her critique of the period’s subjection of women, Lambert accepts the common argument that the difference between the genders is psychological and not only biological.  In particular, she accepts the argument advanced by Malebranche that women have a more active faculty of imagination than do men.  But whereas Malebranche and others had drawn the conclusion that this hyperactive imagination prevents women from exercising reason (and concomitantly from governing others), Lambert draws the opposite conclusion.  The essay claims that women’s natural vivacity of imagination and sentiment actually perfects the operations of reason.  Rather than being the antagonist of reason, imagination incites reason to undertake great projects and makes the fruits of reasoning more persuasive to the public.  “I do not think that sentiment weakens the mind; on the contrary, it provides new spiritual powers which illuminate the mind.  It makes the ideas present in the mind livelier, clearer, and more distinct….Persuasion of the heart is higher than that of the mind alone because our conduct often depends on the former.  It is to our imagination and to our heart that nature has committed the conduct of our actions and of its motives.”  Rather than being inferior to men, women appear to possess a certain mental superiority.  The success of ancient and contemporary women in the arts and sciences indicates that they are as capable as are men in pursuing intellectual activities.  Only social prejudice, expressed through the denial of appropriate education, explains the comparative paucity of women who have distinguished themselves in these fields.  The alleged greater attachment of women to the exercise of the imagination and of the sentiments in their decision-making only indicates that in an atmosphere free of gender prejudice women will exercise reason with a greater complement of imagery and of passion than do most men.

c. Ethics of Love

In several works, Lambert focuses on the central issue of salon debate: the nature of love.  She insists on the moral qualities necessary for authentic love and decries the descent into sexual debauchery that has characterized several prominent salons of the Regency.  The chaste love of mature friendship is both more desirable and more difficult to attain than is the passion-based love of romance.  Intellectual love between adults of the opposite sex constitutes the apex of this ideal moral friendship.

New Reflections on Women defines love as the central sentiment of human life.  Due to its interiority and its power, love enjoys a primacy among human sentiments.  “The difference between love and other pleasures is easy to detect for those who have been touched by it.  In order to be felt, most pleasures require the presence of the proper external object.  Music, cuisine, and theater are examples of pleasures that must have their immediate object in order to make their impressions, to call the soul to them and to hold the soul attentive….It is not the same with love.  It is within us, it is a part of ourselves.  It does not only exist in tandem with its corresponding object; we can experience love without the presence of the object.”  The superiority of love over other desires springs from the capacity of its sentiments to dominate the moral agent even in the absence of the beloved other person.  Memory and imagination deepen the force of a sentimental state that can captivate the human subject on the basis of fantasy alone.

Despite Lambert’s correlation of love with pleasure, Treatise on Friendship underscores that the highest form of love is disinterested friendship among peers rather than romantic affection.  Such mature friendship is based on virtue rather than passion.  “The first merit we must seek in our friends is virtue.  This is what assures us that they are capable and worthy of friendship.  We should expect nothing from our relationships which lack this foundation.”  Focused on the needs of the other, authentic friendship frees one from self-preoccupation and encourages altruistic service of the beloved.  “Friendship is a relationship, a contract, or a type of reciprocal commitment where one demands nothing, where the most worthy person gives more than is expected and is happy to do so in advance.  One shares one’s fortune with one’s friend: wealth, credit, concern, services, everything except one’s honor.”  Only in this virtuous friendship is the human person freed from the calculation of conquest and approval which characterizes most interpersonal affection.

Departing from its classical precedents, Treatise on Friendship argues that such a virtuous, altruistic friendship is not limited to peers of the same sex.  Chaste, intellectual friendship between members of the opposite sex constitutes the highest embodiment of such a meritorious relationship since it demands strict discipline of one’s personal passions.  “They ask if friendship can endure among members of different sex.   Although it is rare and difficult, this is the most delightful of friendships.  It is the most difficult because it requires more virtue and more restraint.”  At its apogee in altruistic friendship, the sentiment of love is so thoroughly refined by the rational will that the passions can no longer distort it.

d. Social Criticism

Like other moralistes of the period, Lambert criticizes the injustices of French society.  Economic inequality constitutes one of the principal injustices of this highly stratified society.  Avarice constitutes the major vice of an aristocracy transformed into avid courtiers.

Reflections on Wealth describes the rapacious efforts to acquire material wealth as a distortion of the human quest for happiness.  Whereas human beings can only find authentic happiness in the intellectual and moral goods of the soul, the social elite seeks an illusory happiness in the amassment of ever-increasing fortunes.  Such wealth may procure social approval and temporary pleasure, but the illusory nature of this unstable pleasure inevitably manifests itself.  “Riches are vain in their use and insatiable in their possession of us.  They are vain because of the false idea they give of themselves.  This idea is founded not on our real being but on our imaginary being.  Everything surrounding those favored with wealth serves their illusions.”  This illusion magnifies the egocentrism of a humanity marked by the fall.  Other people, even the earth itself (with its deposits of precious metals), become objects which exist to be exploited by and to adorn an aristocracy poisoned by avarice.

Despite its moral tares, this human avidity possesses a certain public utility.  The desire to be admired for one’s wealth-related grandeur drives many of the wealthy to provide a material assistance toward the poor which they would not otherwise give.  “Nothing is so great and nothing gives us such an illustrious position in the imagination of others as does the contribution of our wealth to the public weal.  Making one’s wealth flow to so many unfortunates is to give them a new type of existence which pulls them out of their desperate state.”  Like many social thinkers of the eighteenth-century, Lambert identifies material self-interest as the motor of public philanthropy.

Lambert’s critique of the intolerable lot of the poor in contemporary French society becomes explicitly gendered in her Treatise of Old Age.  It is women who bear the brunt of the material impoverishment and psychological isolation of old age.  “Throughout their lives, we have given men all the assistance necessary to perfect their reason and to teach them the great science of happiness.  Cicero composed a treatise on old age to help them draw benefits from an age where everything seems to leave us.  We do this work only for men.  For women in all ages, on the contrary, we simply abandon them to themselves.  We neglect their education in their youth.  During the rest of their lives, we deprive them of the support they need for their old age.  As a result, the majority of women live without care and without the ability to reflect on their state.  In their youth they are vain and dissipated; in their old age, frail and disheveled.”  It is the deprivation of education, especially of the methodical formation of reason and of the capacity for personal reflection, which provokes the material and psychological impoverishment of women, once their romantic and maternal utility has vanished.  The result of neither nature nor accident, this impoverishment of aging women reflects the gender imbalance of a society centered around the needs of men.

e. Religious Philosophy

Lambert’s writings exhibit the nascent deism of the period.  Although she repeatedly praises the virtue of piety, Lambert accords religious virtues a palpably secondary role in the constellation of moral virtues she commends to her readers.  Religion provides a cornerstone for the moral virtues the human person must cultivate, but the deity presiding over this religious theology is the deist Supreme Being rather than the biblical God of redemption and grace.

The deistic character of Lambert’s religious philosophy appears clearly in her Counsels of a Mother to her Son.  Although she insists that the greatest duty of the son is to “render worship to the Supreme Being,” this religious sentiment is markedly constricted.  The purpose of religion is to inspire the moral agent to fulfill his or her duties.  Prayer is an occasion to compare oneself with the moral order God has manifested in the cosmos.  “Moral virtues are in danger without the Christian ones.  I do not ask from you a piety full of weaknesses and superstition; I only ask that a love of moral order would submit to God your inclinations and your sentiments and that the same love of order would spill over on your conduct.  That will give you justice and the presence of justice will guarantee the existence of all the virtues.”  Religion is instrumentalized as an efficacious tool of moral formation and motivation.  Communion with God is based not on grace but on rational scrutiny of one’s conformity to the moral order detectable in nature.  It is the natural virtue of justice, and not the supernatural virtues of faith, hope, and charity, which constitutes the apex of the moral virtues fostered by an enlightened religiosity shorn of irrationality and superstition.

The religious virtue praised by Lambert is generic in nature.  Respect for religion entails respect for the particular religion established by the sovereign of the state.  “One does not attack religion when one has no interest in attacking it.  Nothing makes one happier than having the mind convinced and the heart touched by religion.  That is a good in all times.  Even those who are not fortunate enough to believe as they choose should submit to the established religion.  They know that what is called ‘prejudice’ has great standing in society and that it must be respected.”   The treatment of religious truth in this passage is markedly skeptical.  The assimilation of religion to a popular ‘prejudice’ is not refuted; it is simply useful to respect such a widespread belief, even if it is tainted by custom and bias.  The particular religion to be respected and embraced varies from one society to another, since it is the religious confession established by the state.  In France, this is Catholicism defended by the monarchy, but in other cultures this can easily be another religious confession whose tenets are enforced by a different type of political sovereignty.

Other writings, notably Counsels of a Mother to Daughter and Treatise on Old Age, commend the virtue of piety to women.  But despite the occasional Christian references, the religious sentiment lauded by Lambert remains closer to rationalist deism than to the Catholic sentiment of adoration and submission rooted in grace.

f. Aesthetics

In several works, Lambert studies the subjective dimension of aesthetics.  She explores how the taste for beauty develops in the human mind.  She also studies the related mental qualities of delicacy and refinement, which permit the human person to recognize beauty in nature or in artifacts.

Reflections on Taste concedes an irreducible subjectivity to the phenomenon of taste.  Whereas discursive reasoning inevitably leads to certain conclusions according to the rules of logic and of evidence, judgments of taste often evince irresolvable contradictions.  “Taste is the first movement and a type of instinct which draws us and guides us more surely than all the work of reason.  There is no necessary agreement among tastes.  This is not the same thing as among truths.  It is obvious that whoever concedes my premises will also agree with the consequences I draw.  In this way one may lead an intelligent person to accept one’s opinion, but one is never sure that one can lead a sensitive person to one’s judgment of taste.  There are no links or enticements to make someone else agree with this judgment.  Nothing is certain in the domain of taste; everything springs from the disposition of one’s interior organs and the relationship established between them and external objects.”  Despite its power over the human person’s judgment, taste delivers subjective judgments inasmuch as it depends on the physiology and the psychology unique to each person in the exercise of aesthetic perception.

Despite this subjective dimension, the essay insists that some judgments of taste are more justified than are others.   Although taste eludes analytic definition, it can be evoked intuitively for those who have experienced the difference in quality of aesthetic judgments.  “Right taste delivers a proper judgment on everything we call pleasing, satisfying, fitting, fine, or, so to speak, the flora of the soul.  It is this je ne sais quoi of wisdom and of skillfulness, which knows what is appropriate and which senses in each object the correct proportion it must possess.”  Although judgments of taste do not follow the strict logic of discursive reason, they are not arbitrary.  Irreducible to a formula, experience indicates that certain minds excel in the recognition of the obscure formal qualities that constitute the beauty of an external object.

Against emotivism and relativism, Lambert argues that the faculty of taste possesses a partial intellectual dimension.  “Up to the present, good taste has been defined as ‘a custom established for the members of high society who are sophisticated and discriminating.’  I think that good taste depends on two things: a sentiment of great delicacy in the heart and a great correctness in the mind.”  If Lambertian taste begins as a subjective movement of instinct and feeling, it only reaches its mature term when the intellect has refined this initial impression through a scrutiny of the formal qualities, especially the harmony and balance, of the external object under consideration.

g. Cartesianism

Lambert’s writings make few explicit references to Descartes, but her writings are suffused with Cartesian philosophy.  Although the degree of her personal knowledge of the texts of Descartes remains unclear, Lambert clearly imbibed the pervasive Cartesianism of the salons, militantly diffused in her own salon by Fontenelle.

The literary portrait Monsieur de la Motte provides a Cartesian definition of philosophy.  “To philosophize is to render to reason all its dignity and to make it enter into its rights.  It is to relate each object to its proper principles.  It is to shake off the yoke of opinion and of authority.”  In its attack on public opinion and appeals to authority as the antonym of right reason, this rationalist concept of philosophy clearly follows the path of Cartesianism.

In several works, this Cartesian apology for reason warns the reader of the dangers of reliance on public opinion.  Counsels of a Mother to her Daughter emphasizes the necessity to abandon prejudice, custom, and public opinion if one seeks to reason properly.  “Give yourself a true idea of things.  Don’t judge like the common people do.  Don’t yield your judgment to that of public opinion.  Throw off the prejudices of childhood.”  Similarly, the Dialogue between Alexander and Diogenes on the Equality of Goods condemns Alexander the Great’s reliance on the esteem of the public.  “I know very well that you [Alexander] have the masses for you.  The number of the wise is very small.  As much as you are a prince, you are still a man of the common people in your way of thinking.  Always dependant on the opinion of other people, you place your happiness in the judgments of others.”   It is Diogenes, the representative of the intellectual elite which relies on reason rather than on fluctuating public opinion, who has access to the truth.

Lambert’s Cartesian orientation often emerges in her treatment of specific areas of human endeavor.  Counsels of a Mother to Her Son considers history, focused on human passions and chance events, as inferior to the study of metaphysics, where the student can discover universal, immutable principles.  “Your ordinary reading must be history, but you must join reflection to it.  Don’t think of filling your memory with facts, of decorating your mind with the thoughts and opinions of authors.  This would only turn your mind into a store filled with the ideas of other people.  A quarter of an hour of reflection does more to deepen and form the mind than do hours of reading.  You should not fear a lack of knowledge; rather, you should fear error and false judgments.  Reflection is the guide leading to truth.”  Counsels of a Mother to her Daughter closely follows Descartes’s Discourse on Method in its exemption of religion from the rationalist censure of appeals to authority.  “In the area of religion, one must yield to authorities, but on every other subject, one must only accept the authority of reason and of evidence.”  As a result of this split in warrants between religious and non-religious knowledge, theological belief becomes a matter of arational assent.  “As a great man [Malebranche] said, ‘To be a Christian, one must believe blindly; to be wise, one must see the evidence.”  In this Cartesian framework, reason is not only to be exercised in metaphysics and science to discover indubitable, immutable principles; it is be used in other areas of human life to eliminate or at least to temper the weight of authority and custom on human judgment.

4. Reception and Interpretation

The reception of Madame de Lambert’s writings and philosophy has been checkered.  In the eighteenth century a large, cultivated European public purchased numerous editions of her works in French, English, German, and Spanish.  French Enlightenment philosophers, notably Bayle, Fontenelle, Montesquieu, and Voltaire, praised her contribution to moral philosophy.  By the late nineteenth century, however, Lambert was little read.  It is significant that the first twentieth-century edition of Lambert’s works occurred only at the very end of the century (1990) with Granderoute’s critical edition.

Several factors explain the eclipse of Lambert’s philosophy.  First, the marquise wrote in the style of literary miniatures that were popular in the salons of the period.  She often expressed her philosophy in the genre of the essay, the literary dialogue, the maxim, or the literary portrait.  Genres that appeared charming in the boudoirs of the Regency often appeared precious to a later literary public.  Written outside the framework of the systematic treatise, the essays’ arguments on virtue or politics or aesthetics often seemed unphilosophical to a later philosophical public accustomed to university norms of academic argument.

Second, Madame de Lambert wrote from and for a philosophical culture which has vanished.  She could presume that her listeners had studied the Stoicism of Plutarch and Cicero in their schooldays as she had.  Even indirect references to the classical authors would be immediately grasped.  Paraphrases of Montaigne or Pascal required no further explanation.  Any educated Frenchman or Frenchwoman in the early eighteenth century would possess at least a hazy outline of the skepticism represented by each of these masters of modern French prose.

The recent renaissance of philosophical interest in Lambert is tied to the neo-feminist expansion of the cannon of the humanities in early modernity.  Several recent studies focus on the question of gender and the status of women in Lambert.  The interpretations offered by Fassiotto (1984) and Beasely (1992) illustrate this tendency.  Other contributions by Lambert to moral philosophy, such as her virtue theory and her critique of the influence of popular opinion on moral judgment, await further research.

5. References and Further Reading

All translations from French to English above are by the author of this article.

a. Primary Sources

  • Lambert, Anne-Thérèse de Marguenat de Courcelles, marquise de. Oeuvres complètes de madame la marquise de Lambert. Paris: L. Collin, 1808.
    • A digital version of this edition of the works of Madame de Lambert is available at Gallica: bibliothèque numérique on the website of the Bibliothèque nationale de France.
  • Lambert, Anne-Thérèse de Marguenat de Courcelles, marquise de. Oeuvres, ed. Robert Granderoute. Paris: Librairie Honoré Champion, 1990.
    • This excellent critical edition of the works of Madame de Lambert has become the standard scholarly edition.
  • Lambert, Ann-Thérèse de Marguenat de Courcelles, marquise de. The Works of the Marchionesse de Lambert. Containing Thoughts on various entertaining and useful Subjects, Reflections on Education, on the writings of Homer and on various public Events of the Time. Carefully Translated from the French. London: William Owen, 1749.
    • This first English translation of the collected works of Madame de Lambert underwent four re-editions in the eighteenth century.  Digital texts of the English versions of several of Lambert’s works can be found at the following Internet sites: American Libraries Internet Archive and Google Book Search.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Barth-Cao Danh, Michèle. La philosophie cognitive et morale d’Anne-Thérèse de Lambert, 1647-1733: La volonté d’être. New York: Peter Lang, 2002.
    • This original monograph studies the epistemology of Madame de Lambert.
  • Beasely, Faith. “Anne-Thérèse de Lambert and the Politics of Taste,” Papers on French Seventeenth Century Literature, 1992, Vol. 19; no.37: 337-44.
    • The article focuses on gender in its analysis of aesthetic judgment and politics in Lambert.
  • Daniélou, Catherine. “L’amour-propre éclairé: Madame de Lambert et Pierre Nicole,” Papers on French Seventeenth Century Literature, 1995, Vol. 22, no. 42: 171-83.
    • [Daniélou contrasts the link between self-love and social utility in the philosophies of Lambert and of the Jansenist Nicole
  • Fassiotto, Marie-José. Madame de Lambert (1644-1733), ou, Le féminism moral. New York: Peter Lang, 1984.
    • Fassiotto explores gender issues in Lambert but the attribution of feminism is anachronistic.
  • Granderoute, Robert. “Madame de Lambert et Montaigne,” Bulletin de la Société des Amis de Montaigne, 1981, nos. 7-8: 97-106.
    • Granderoute demonstrates the dependence of Lambert on the thought and texts of Montaigne.
  • Granderoute, Robert. “De l’Education des filles aux Avis d’une mère à une fille: Fénelon et madame de Lambert,” Revue d’Histoire littéraire de la France,” 1987, no. 1: 15-30.
    • Granderoute examines the influence of Fénelon on Lambert’s educational philosophy.
  • Hine, Ellen McNiven. Madame de Lambert, her Sources and her Circle. Oxford: The Voltaire Foundation, 1973.
    • Hine studies Lambert’s ancient and contemporary intellectual sources.
  • Hoffman, Paul. “Madame de Lambert et l’exigence de dignité,” Travaux de linguistique et de littérature, 1973, vol. 11, no. 2: 19-32.
    • Hoffman analyzes the central concept of dignity in the ethics and political thought of Lambert.
  • Kryssing-Berg, Ginette, “La marquise de Lambert ou l’ambivalence de la vertu,” Revue Romane, 1982, Vol. 17: 35-45.
    • Kryssing-Berg studies the tension between virtue and social utility in Lambert’s ethics.
  • Marchal, Roger. Madame de Lambert et son milieu. Oxford: The Voltaire Foundation, 1991.
    • Marchal examines the aristocratic and salon context of Lambert’s thought.

Author Information

John J. Conley
Loyola University in Maryland
U. S. A.

Françoise d’Aubigné, marquise de Maintenon (1635—1719)

maintenonThe second wife of King Louis XIV of France, Madame de Maintenon has long fascinated historians and novelists by her improbable life.  Born into an impoverished, criminal family, Maintenon conquered salon society as the wife of the poet Paul Scarron. During her salon years, she studied the philosophical currents of the period, notably libertinism and Cartesianism.  Maintenon then conquered court society as the governess of the illegitimate children of King Louis XIV and finally as the wife of the widowed King. The controversies surrounding her social ascent have long obscured the contributions of Maintenon to educational and moral philosophy. The founder and director of the celebrated school for women at Saint-Cyr, Maintenon defended her theories of education for women in a series of addresses to the Saint-Cyr faculty. In her pedagogical philosophy, practical moral formation rather than intellectual cultivation emerges as the primary goal of schooling.  Her dramatic dialogues and addresses to students developed her distinctive moral philosophy, based on detailed analysis of the moral virtues to be cultivated by the pupils.  In her account of the cardinal virtues, temperance holds pride of place. Addressing Saint-Cyr’s student body of aristocratic girls and women, Maintenon devoted particular attention to the virtues of civility essential for polite society. Her philosophy of virtues is a gendered one inasmuch as Maintenon attempted to redefine traditionally masculine virtues in terms of current female experience.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Works
  3. Philosophical Themes
    1. Philosophy of Education
    2. Virtue Theory
    3. Virtue and Gender
    4. Virtue and Class
  4. Reception and Interpretation
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Biography

Françoise d’Augbigné was born on November 27-28, 1635, allegedly in the prison of Niort in central France.  Her father Constant d’Aubigné was a career criminal who had received jail terms for murder, kidnapping, treason, and debt.  Disowned by his father Agrippa d’Aubigné, a prominent Huguenot military officer and poet, Constant d’Aubigné had married Jeanne de Cardhilac, daughter of Niort’s prison warden, in 1627.  Françoise’s harrowing childhood included a stay in Martinique (1645-1647) during one of her father’s failed political adventures; a bitter stay with a distant relative who used her as a domestic servant (1648); tempestuous periods at Ursuline convent schools in Niort and Paris (1648); and a painful return to her impoverished mother (1649-1652), during which time the young Françoise was forced to beg in the streets.  A personal witness to the religious divisions of the period, she was baptized Catholic by her mother at birth, raised as a Protestant by her kindly aunt, Madame de Villette, and then converted to Catholicism by her Ursuline teachers.  The adolescent study of Plutarch introduced her to the period’s vogue for Stoicism and cultivated her lifelong taste for the literature of moral edification.

In 1652 Françoise d’Aubigné married her only suitor: the poet Paul Scarron.  The odd match became an object of ridicule in the Parisian salons.  Twenty-five years her senior, Scarron was a paralyzed, impotent satirist renowned for the vitriol of his verse burlesques.  Despite its unpromising origins, the marriage proved a reasonable success.  Madame Scarron patiently nursed a sickly husband who visibly esteemed his beautiful and intelligent young wife.  The tiny apartment of the Scarrons quickly became a salon for Parisian authors of a libertine bent.  Madame Scarron acquired a philosophical culture from the salon habitués: Benserade, Chapelain, Vivonne, Saint-Aignan, Costar, and Ménage.  She was especially influenced by George Brossin, chevalier de Méré, the essayist who argued that the honnête homme, the temperate person who exercised restraint in arriving at judgments, should be the moral ideal of an age exhausted by religious fanaticism.  During these salon sessions Madame Scarron also read and debated the works of Descartes.

At the death of her husband in 1660, Madame Scarron faced a precarious future, but her salon contacts permitted her to find some financial support and to continue her pursuit of literary and philosophical culture.  In 1669 she accepted a delicate mission: to serve as the governess for the illegitimate children of Louis XIV and her fellow salonnière, Madame de Montespan.  Her skillful education of the children impressed the king and his stormy mistress.  Her expert nursing of their son, the Duke of Maine, during a serious illness appeared to them miraculous.  In 1674, a grateful Louis XIV granted the devoted governess the lands and title of the fief of Maintenon.  Newly ennobled and financially secure, Madame de Maintenon now took her own place as a titled aristocrat among the courtiers of Versailles.  When the affair between Louis XIV and Madame de Montespan collapsed, Maintenon encouraged the king to reconcile with his estranged wife, Marie-Thérèse of Austria.  The successful reconciliation between the spouses enhanced Maintenon’s standing in court but earned her the enmity of her old patron, Madame de Montespan.

After the sudden death of Queen Marie-Thérèse on July 9, 1683, the king drew closer to Maintenon.  On October 9, 1683, the archbishop of Paris married the couple in a private ceremony.  The bride’s modest social origins raised a problem, since Louis XIV had insisted on dynastic marriages for other members of his family.  The marriage was never publicly announced, although the court quickly perceived that Madame de Maintenon had assumed the role and duties of Louis XIV’s legitimate wife.  The private marriage was also morganatic; Maintenon would never assume the title of queen and no relative of hers could claim the right to the throne.

In 1684 Maintenon began her life’s work: the construction of a school for the education of daughters of the impoverished nobility.  Situated in 1686 at Saint-Cyr, the Institute of Saint Louis was generously subsidized by Louis XIV.  Maintenon personally supervised the direction of the school, designed to serve two hundred and fifty students.  The school possessed a comparatively sophisticated curriculum, featuring courses in religion, reading, writing, mathematics, Latin, music, painting, dancing, needlework, and home economics.  Dissatisfied with the narrowly religious education provided by the convent schools of the period, Maintenon founded her own lay group of teachers, the Dames of Saint-Louis, to provide instruction.  Maintenon insisted that dialogue rather than lecture was to be the primary means of education in the Saint-Cyr classroom.

Saint-Cyr underwent three distinct periods in its pedagogical development.  In its artistic period (1686-1689), the school emphasized cultural achievement by its students.  Sophisticated concerts, plays, debates, and liturgical services soon attracted a prestigious Parisian public.  The artistic period achieved its culmination in the world premiere of Jean Racine’s Esther on January 26, 1689.  The cultural triumph of the school, however, created educational problems.  Dazzled by the applause of the court, students began to neglect their studies; class time began to shrink in favor of rehearsals for the elaborate school performances.

During its mystical period (1690-97), Maintenon sought to combat the worldliness of the earlier artistic phase by promoting piety in the school.  The faculty and students soon fell under the influence of Madame de Guyon, a controversial religious leader and friend of Maintenon.  The Quietism promoted by Guyon stressed simplicity in prayer, confidence in God, and retirement from the world.  Maintenon grew disenchanted with a piety that seemed to undercut the acquisition of virtue and ardor in one’s studies and future work.  By the middle of the decade, Maintenon encouraged Louis XIV’s campaign against Quietism and the expulsion of faculty sympathetic to Quietism.

By the end of the seventeenth century, Maintenon had guided Saint-Cyr toward the pedagogical model she would support until her death.  This approach to education stressed the acquisition of moral virtues by the students and development of the practical skills these impoverished women would need in their future lives as wives of provincial aristocrats in straitened financial circumstances.  This practical mode of education, with its distinctive moralistic coloration, would remain the guiding ethos of Saint-Cyr until its dissolution by revolutionaries in 1793.

Given the secret nature of her marriage, Maintenon’s influence on the court of Louis XIV remained a discreet one.  She clearly counseled her husband on religious matters, especially the appointment of bishops and abbots, but her role in the Revocation of the Edict of Nantes and the intensification of anti-Protestant measures by Louis XIV has been exaggerated by later critics.  Her primary interest remained the direction of the school at Saint-Cyr, to which she retired in 1715, shortly after the death of Louis XIV.

Madame de Maintenon died at Saint-Cyr on April 17, 1719.

2. Works

The majority of the works left by Madame de Maintenon originated during her tenure at the Institute of Saint Louis (1686-1719).  The Dames of Saint-Louis carefully transcribed the many addresses Maintenon delivered to the faculty and student body.  Maintenon would then correct and revise the transcriptions.  In addition, she composed dramatic monologues to be performed in class.  The Dames collected these various texts of Madame de Maintenon into a series of manuscript collections, the last and largest of which date from 1740.  In addition, a massive correspondence of over five thousand letters written by Maintenon has survived.  Théophile Lavallée’s multi-volume edition of Maintenon’s writings (1854-66) remains the most thorough print edition of Maintenon, but we remain far from a complete – let alone a critical – edition of her works.

Of particular philosophical importance are the writings where Maintenon treats ethical issues, especially the nature of virtue and vice.  Her Entretiens are conferences with the Saint-Cyr faculty in which Maintenon emphasizes the formation in virtue that is the principal end of education at the school.  Her Instructions are addresses to the students in which she censures the typical vices and exalts the ideal virtues of the student body.  Her Conversations (dialogues) are brief morality plays that define and illustrate the major virtues the student must inculcate.  Maintenon’s approach to ethics is gendered inasmuch as she redefines the virtues and vices, originally defined in terms of male experience, in the framework of typical women’s experience.  Her approach is also class-conscious, since she attempts to redefine the virtues in the perspective of women who are simultaneously aristocratic and impoverished.

3. Philosophical Themes

The primary philosophical interest of Maintenon’s works lies in its treatment of two related topics: educational theory and virtue theory.  For Maintenon, the primary goal of education is the formation of the moral character of the pupil, interpreted according to the canons of Counter-reformational Catholicism.  The secondary goal is vocational formation.  In the case of Saint-Cyr, it is the development of the skills and the moral habits of the pupil who faces the future as a member of the impoverished, provincial nobility.  Maintenon transforms the nature of moral virtue according to the demands of gender and social class.  Traditionally masculine virtues, such as courage, are redefined to serve as the ideal ethical traits of the industrious wife largely confined to the domestic sphere.  Virtues typical of the aristocratic class, notably politeness and civility, are raised to the status of primary moral dispositions.

a. Philosophy of Education

In her addresses to the faculty of Saint-Cyr, Maintenon sketches her philosophy of education.  The ends of education are traditional: the formation of moral character for a Catholic member of the provincial aristocracy.  But the dialogical methods of pedagogy championed by Maintenon exhibit a distinctive modernity.

Of Solid Education explains the educational end of Saint-Cyr for the faculty: “You [the teachers] apply yourself to developing the piety, the reason, and the morals of your girls.  You inspire in them the love and practices of all virtues proper to them now and in the future.”  Maintenon insists that the virtue to be cultivated and the means used to achieve this ethical culture must always be “reasonable,” but this reasonableness is of a practical rather than speculative nature.  Of the Education of Young Ladies specifies how this practical reasonableness differs from erudition or aesthetic achievement: “You [the teachers] should concern yourself less with furnishing their mind than with forming their reason.  Obviously, this approach provides less occasion for the knowledge and skill of the schoolmistress to sparkle.  A young woman who has memorized a thousand things impresses her family and friends more than does a girl who simply knows how to exercise her judgment, when to be silent, how to be modest and reserved, how to avoid rushing into showing what she thinks about something.”  This pedagogical ideal of practical reasonableness underscores the primacy Maintenon accords the virtues of discretion and restraint for aristocratic women, who are often plunged into dangerous political controversies.  It also expresses the mature Maintenon’s disillusionment with the aesthetic and mystical ideals that had earlier served as the educational end of Saint-Cyr.

To maintain the moral atmosphere of the school, Maintenon insists on a strict regime of censorship.  In Of the Danger of Profane Books, she condemns the use of all books that lack explicit religious or moral utility.  “I call profane all books that are not religious, even if they seem innocent, as soon as it is clear that they have no real usefulness.  Teach your pupils to be extremely cautious in their reading.  They should always prefer their needlework, housework, or their duties in their state of life to it.  If they really want to read, ensure that they use carefully chosen books apt to nourish their faith, to cultivate their judgment, and to guide their morals.”  Of the Proper Choice of Theatrical Pieces underlines the risk of heresy as well as of moral corruption run by too lenient a regime of literary surveillance: “Don’t you [the teachers] realize the ease with which you grant entry to these little booklets without preliminary approval exposes your pupils to the greatest dangers?  If the Jansenists and the Quietists knew this weakness, they would immediately find the secret in order to spread their errors.  They would flood you with pamphlets containing the maxims, phrases, and songs which they sell for practically nothing.”  Theoretical instruction in the demands of virtue is insufficient for the actual cultivation of it.  The personal moral modeling by the faculty and the strictly moral and religiously orthodox atmosphere maintained by the faculty in the school are essential for the successful maturation of the Saint-Cyr pupil along the lines of Maintenon’s practical reasonableness.

If character formation is the central goal of education, the teacher must engage in regular dialogue with her pupils.  In her faculty addresses, Maintenon criticizes the tendency of teachers to use lectures and to overvalue the cultivation of the memory of their pupils.  To assist in the perfection of moral character, the schoolmistress should regularly engage in conversation with her pupils.  Of the Education of Ladies argues that teacher-pupil dialogue should occur outside as well as inside the classroom: “On occasion you [the teachers] should be ready to chat informally with your pupils.  This will help the pupils to love and trust you.  You can acquire an influence over them that will prove beneficial.”  The pupil is not to remain passive in this dialogue.  The teacher can function as an accurate spiritual director only if the pupil discloses her actual moral struggles and achievements: “Sometimes you [the teachers] should let them express their will so that you may understand their basic dispositions.  You then more accurately teach them the differences between the good, the evil, and the morally indifferent.”  Maintenon’s insistence on a dialogical method of instruction reflects the value placed on refined conversation in the aristocratic circles of the period; it also expresses the conviction that the pedagogy of moral formation cannot succeed if the moral tutor has not gauged the actual moral temperament of the pupil as the tutor guides her to the school’s ideal of ethical maturity.

b. Virtue Theory

In several works Maintenon analyzes the four cardinal virtues: justice, fortitude, prudence, and temperance.  Strikingly, whereas most philosophers would name justice as the most important virtue, Maintenon prizes temperance as the central virtue in a moral character.  Without the restraining hand of temperance, the other virtues would quickly deteriorate into rigorism, foolhardiness, or fearfulness.

In the dialogue On the Cardinal Virtues, Maintenon defends this primacy of temperance in the ensemble of virtues.  At the beginning of the dialogue, Justice presents its traditional claim as the preeminent virtue: “There is nothing as beautiful as Justice.  It always has truth beside it.  It judges without bias.  It puts everything into order.  It knows how to condemn its friends and to honor the rights of its enemies.  It can even condemn itself.  It only honors what is worthy of honor.”  But the other cardinal virtues soon manifest their eminence over justice by demonstrating why and how the virtue of justice must be subordinated to them in order for justice to actually achieve its social ends.  Prudence prevents justice from acting in too brusque a manner.  “I [prudence] regulate its [justice’s] operations, prevent it from precipitation, make it take its time.”  Similarly, fortitude strengthens justice when justice hesitates to execute proper punishment on a friend.  “You [justice] need me [fortitude] because your sense of affection makes you find it difficult to inflict any pain on a friend.”  While justice can determine where to assign just dessert, the execution of this determination requires the conjugated virtues of prudence and fortitude to avoid the distortions of severity or pusillanimity.

Standing above prudence and fortitude is the virtue of temperance.  It imposes itself as the central virtue inasmuch as it prevents the other virtues from deteriorating into their customary excesses.  “I destroy gluttony and excess.  I tolerate no outbursts. Not only am I opposed to all evil; I moderate all good.  Without me, Justice would be intolerable to human weakness, Fortitude would drive us to despair, Prudence would often prevent us from taking the actions we should and make waste our time weighing every option.  But with me, Justice acquires a capacity for circumspection, Fortitude acquires suppleness, and Prudence continues to provide advice, but now without undue hesitation, without too much or too little haste.  In a word, I am the remedy to all forms of extremism.”  The primacy accorded temperance in the hierarchy of virtue parallels the emphasis accorded the values of discretion and good reputation in the education provided at Saint-Cyr.

Even the virtues of religion must subordinate themselves to the empire of temperance.  Exercises of piety are to be commended only to the extent that they reflect the moderation and sobriety typical of the virtue of temperance.  “I [temperance] must temper a religious zeal that is too busy, too emotional, and indiscreet.  I have to encourage conduct that avoids extremes.  I moderate both the inclination to give alms and the inclination to hoard money.  I moderate the length of prayer, ascetical practices, recollection, silence, and good works.  I shorten a sermon, a spiritual dialogue, or an examination of conscience.”  Echoing Méré’s portrait of the honnête homme, Maintenon’s moral ideal of the student is the woman who subjects all thought and action to the moderating influence of temperance.  Neither the mystic nor the activist represents Maintenon’s ideal of the moral agent who distinguishes herself through the modesty and emotional restraint with which she serves her neighbor.

c. Virtue and Gender

Given her exclusively feminine public of students and faculty, Maintenon often transforms the nature of the virtues in order to accommodate the sex-specific experience of women of the period.  Her gendered transformation of virtue is apparent in her analysis of three particular virtues: courage, glory, and eminence.

The dramatic dialogue On Courage demonstrates how women as well as men are required to cultivate the virtue of courage.  At the beginning of the dialogue, Faustine insists that courage is not proper for women. “Courage is not having any fear.  This type of achievement is not for our sex.”  Victoria counters that, although women are not called to cultivate the martial courage proper to men, there are other types of courage necessary to women.  “Certainly courage is opposed to fear.  But there is more than one kind of fear.  It is not necessary for us to cultivate the courage that makes someone go to war or be willing to risk his life.”  It is precisely the pupils and alumnae of Saint-Cyr who illustrate the type of courage proper to women.  Courage within the school manifests itself in the diligence with which one executes the duties of the school day.  “There are those who joyfully fulfill all their duties and who are first in everything.  They love work, they want to please their teachers, and they want to do even more than one asks of them.”  Saint-Cyr alumnae express this gendered courage by enduring the constraints of the impoverished life of the provincial aristocracy.  Emily muses about “the poverty we may find in the future and the foul character of those with whom we will have to deal.  They very well might criticize without the moderation we are accustomed to here [at Saint-Cyr].”  Distinct from the courage of the warrior, the courage of women presents itself as the capacity to endure academic and domestic obstacles in the patient pursuit of one’s personal vocation as student or mistress of the manor.

Similarly, glory is redefined away from its traditionally masculine framework of military prowess or political preeminence.  For Maintenon, glory is a matter of personal integrity that could manifest itself as easily in domestic work as in military or political achievement.  The address On True Glory defines glory as a species of personal honor:  “I believe that true glory consists in loving one’s honor and in never performing any base action.”  Maintenonian glory is clearly gendered.  It not only includes the refusal of any major sin; it encompasses the refusal of typical female indiscretions, such as flirtation, receiving gifts from men, or accepting letters from men unknown to the addressee.  The address insists that glory is not a biological category, reposing on one’s familial descent; it is a type of integrity and self-reliance allied to hard work.  “There is much more nobility in living from one’s work and from one’s savings than in being a burden to one’s friends….I wouldn’t tell rich people to sell their needlework, but I would tell those who aren’t so rich to do so.”  Rather than being tied to distinguished public achievement, glory emerges as a simple preeminence in the practice of sacrificial virtues of service.  “We ordinarily recognize glory by its honesty and even by its humility, by its concern to give pleasure to others, to relieve pain, to avoid giving offense, and to render service.”  Freed from its traditional accoutrements of wealth, military valor, and social prominence, the redefined virtue of glory can now be cultivated as easily by impoverished women as it is by others.

In the dialogue On Eminence, Maintenon redefines the aristocratic virtue of eminence to include the experience of impoverished but industrious women.  The dialogue denies that eminence consists in social rank or economic fortune; on the contrary, authentic eminence consists in an unusual degree of self-mastery.  “True eminence consists in esteeming virtue alone, in knowing how to distance ourselves from fortune when it turns against us and how to avoid being intoxicated by fortune when it turns our way.  It consists in sharing the destiny of the unfortunate and in never holding them in contempt.”  In this fusion of neo-Stoic and Christian theories of virtue, eminence denotes both volitional equilibrium and sacrificial love of the suffering neighbor.  The dialogue also insists that authentic eminence must be acquired through personal merit and struggle, not conferred by family descent or inherited wealth.  “There are different types of nobility.  We have to see ourselves as we are.  We should only raise ourselves up through our own merit.  That is where we find true eminence.”  Paralleling her own controversial career in the French court, Maintenonian eminence subverts a social hierarchy of rank based on biological inheritance and exalts moral and social distinction acquired through tenacious personal endeavor.

d. Virtue and Class

Addressing an aristocratic public, Maintenon devotes particular attention to two virtues prized by court society: politeness and civility.

The address On Politeness insists on the central value of good manners to be cultivated by the pupils at Saint-Cyr.  “Since God has made you ladies by birth, have a lady’s manners.  May those of you who have been properly raised by your parents retain these manners and may the others soon acquire them.”  Maintenon details the components of noble comportment: refined language, upright posture, discreet gestures.  But Maintenon politeness does not limit itself to a code of external conduct; it is ultimately an interior disposition of respect toward all persons whom the mature aristocrat encounters: “Whatever you say or do, be careful to avoid giving offense or embarrassment to anyone.”  The purpose of external polite conduct is to express sensitivity toward the feelings and dignity of others.  Maintenon repeatedly reminds her pupils that this posture of reverence includes one’s servants and social inferiors as well as one’s peers and social superiors.

Complementing the virtue of politeness, the virtue of civility entails a spirit of sacrificial service toward all those with whom one interacts.  The address On Civility presents this virtue as an ascetical attention to the interests and needs of others.  “Civility involves freeing oneself in order to be busy about the needs of other people, in paying attention to what can help or hinder them, in order to do the former and to avoid the latter.  Civility entails not talking about oneself, not making others listen too long to oneself, listening carefully to others, avoiding making conversation focus on oneself and one’s tastes, and permitting the conversation to move naturally toward the accommodation of other people’s interests.”  Although civility includes the salon art of refined conversation, Maintenon presents the virtue as a refined species of humility, in which the concerns of others trump one’s own.

To clarify the nature of authentic civility, Maintenon appeals to the evangelical golden rule.  “The Gospel firmly accords with the duties of a civil life.  You know that Our Lord tells us that we should not do to others what we do not want others to do to us.  This must be our great rule, which does not rule out certain customs traditional in our native lands.”  Civility entails reciprocity, a recognition of the other persons one meets as one’s equal in dignity and in need.  Although On Civility admits that the fluctuating customs of a particular culture may require one to show special deference toward those considered socially superior, Maintenonian civility is built on an egalitarian ethics of mutual respect.

4. Reception and Interpretation

The immediate posthumous reputation of Madame de Maintenon was a largely negative one.  The memoirs of the courtier Louis de Rouvroy, duc de Saint-Simon (1675-1755), and the letters of Charlotte-Elisabeth of Bavaria, duchesse d’ Orléans (1652-1722), depicted Maintenon as a schemer who manipulated Louis XIV’s emotions of grief to achiever her power and then used that power to intensify the anti-Protestant policies of the throne.  The publication of Maintenon’s alleged letters (1752) by the Huguenot writer Laurent Angliviel de La Beaumelle presented Maintenon as the hidden architect of Louis XIV’s Revocation of the Edict of Nantes and other persecutory measures.  Subsequent discovery of the forged nature of the most incriminating letters in La Beaumelle’s collection did little to soften the image of Maintenon as a manipulative bigot, an image still present in Patricia Mazuy’s film Saint-Cyr (2000).

In the nineteenth-century, Théophile Lavallée’s multi-volume edition of the works of Maintenon (1854-66) presented the breadth and complexity of Maintenon’s extensive writings.  Commentators began to note Maintenon’s skill as a moraliste, an analyst of the conflicting interplay of virtue and vice in the human constitution.  In the late nineteenth-century, educational officials of the French Third Republic attempted to foster public high school education for women through the new institution of the lycée. Maintenon’s addresses and dialogues seemed perfectly suited for an adolescent female public cultivating the virtues necessary for citizenship.  The anthologies of Maintenon’s texts assembled by Cadet (1885), Faguet (1885), Geoffroy (1887), and Jacquinet (1888) were textbooks designed for the new lycée.  But these anthologies presented an oddly areligious Maintenon, carefully denatured by the anti-clerical Third Republic.  References to God, religion, and piety were often censored out of her texts; only the more secular virtues survived.

Recent studies of Maintenon have attempted to present a more positive evaluation of Maintenon as a philosopher.  Madeleine Daniélou’s study of Maintenon’s educational theories and practices (1948) underscores her innovations as an educational philosopher and the theological foundations of that philosophy.  John Conley’s English translation of and commentary on Maintenon (2004) describes the complexity of her moral psychology, especially in her account of virtue and freedom.  Other commentators, however, notably Carolyn Lougee (1976) and Carlo François (1987), lament that Maintenon’s educational experiments and theories still confined women to the spheres of the household and of the convent.

5. References and Further Reading

All French to English translations were made by the author of this article.

  1. Primary Sources
  • Maintenon, Françoise d’Aubigné, marquise de Maintenon. Conseils et instructions aux demoiselles pour leur conduite dans le monde. Ed. Théophile Lavallée. 2 vols. Paris: Charpentier, 1857.
    • [Still the standard edition of the major works of Maintenon composed for pupils at Saint-Cyr.]
  • Maintenon, Françoise d’Aubigné, marquise de Maintenon . Lettres et entretiens sur l’éducation des filles. Ed. Théophile Lavallée. 2 vols. Paris: Charpentier, 1854.
    • [A collection of letters and addresses dealing with issues of education.]
  • Maintenon, Françoise d’Aubigné, marquise de Maintenon. Extraits de ses Lettres, Avis, Entretiens, Conversations et Proverbes. 4th ed. Ed. Octave Gréard. Paris: Hachette, 1886.
    • [This anthology of Maintenon’s texts is available online at Gallica, bibliothéque numérique, on the website of the Bibliothèque nationale de France.]
  • Maintenon, Françoise d’Aubigné, marquise de Maintenon. Comment la sagesse vient aux filles. Eds. Pierre-E. Leroy and Marcel Loyau.  Etrepilly: Batrillat, 1998.
    • [Extensive contemporary anthology of Maintenon texts dealing with education.]
  • Maintenon, Françoise d’Aubigné, marquise de Maintenon. Dialogues and Addresses. Trans. and ed. John Conley. Other Voice Series. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 2004.
    • [Contemporary English translation of Maintenon’s major educational texts, accompanied by philosophical commentary.]
  1. Secondary Sources
  • Castelot, André. Madame de Maintenon: La reine secrète. Paris: Perrin, 1996.
    • [A sympathetic study of the political role of Maintenon.]
  • Conley, John. The Suspicion of Virtue: Women Philosophers in Neoclassical France. Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press, 2002. pp. 124-56.
    • [A philosophical analysis of Maintenon’s educational and moral theories.]
  • Daniélou, Madeleine. Madame de Maintenon, éducatrice. Paris: Bloud & Gay, 1946.
    • [A sympathetic rehabilitation of the educational philosophy and theology of Maintenon.]
  • François, Carlo. Précieuses et autres indociles: Aspects du féminisme dans la littérature française du XVIIe siècle. Birmingham, AL: Summa Publications, 1987.
    • [A critical treatment of Maintenon’s work as antifeminist.]
  • Le Nabour, Eric. La Porteuse d’ombre: Madame de Maintenon et le Roi-Soleil. Paris: Tallandier, 1999.
    • [A biography focusing on the role of Maintenon in the court politics at Versailles.]
  • Lougee, Carolyn. Le paradis des femmes: Women, Salons, and Social Stratification in Seventeenth-Century France. Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 1976.
    • [A critical study of Maintenon’s school at Saint-Cyr compared with other period experiments in education of women.]

Author information

John J. Conley
Loyola University of Maryland

Friedrich Nietzsche (1844—1900)

NietzscheNietzsche was a German philosopher, essayist, and cultural critic. His writings on truth, morality, language, aesthetics, cultural theory, history, nihilism, power, consciousness, and the meaning of existence have exerted an enormous influence on Western philosophy and intellectual history.

Nietzsche spoke of "the death of God," and foresaw the dissolution of traditional religion and metaphysics. Some interpreters of Nietzsche believe he embraced nihilism, rejected philosophical reasoning, and promoted a literary exploration of the human condition, while not being concerned with gaining truth and knowledge in the traditional sense of those terms. However, other interpreters of Nietzsche say that in attempting to counteract the predicted rise of nihilism, he was engaged in a positive program to reaffirm life, and so he called for a radical, naturalistic rethinking of the nature of human existence, knowledge, and morality. On either interpretation, it is agreed that he suggested a plan for “becoming what one is” through the cultivation of instincts and various cognitive faculties, a plan that requires constant struggle with one’s psychological and intellectual inheritances.

Nietzsche claimed the exemplary human being must craft his/her own identity through self-realization and do so without relying on anything transcending that life—such as God or a soul.  This way of living should be affirmed even were one to adopt, most problematically, a radical vision of eternity, one suggesting the "eternal recurrence" of all events. According to some commentators, Nietzsche advanced a cosmological theory of “will to power.” But others interpret him as not being overly concerned with working out a general cosmology. Questions regarding the coherence of Nietzsche's views--questions such as whether these views could all be taken together without contradiction, whether readers should discredit any particular view if proven incoherent or incompatible with others, and the like--continue to draw the attention of contemporary intellectual historians and philosophers.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Periodization of Writings
  3. Problems of Interpretation
  4. Nihilism and the Revaluation of Values
  5. The Human Exemplar
  6. Will to Power
  7. Eternal Recurrence
  8. Reception of Nietzsche’s Thought
  9. References and Further Reading
    1. Nietzsche’s Collected Works in German
    2. Nietzsche’s Major Works Available in English
    3. Important Works Available in English from Nietzsche’s Nachlass
    4. Biographies
    5. Commentaries and Scholarly Researches
    6. Academic Journals in Nietzsche Studies

1. Life

Because much of Nietzsche’s philosophical work has to do with the creation of self—or to put it in Nietzschean terms, “becoming what one is”— some scholars exhibit uncommon interest in the biographical anecdotes of Nietzsche’s life. Taking this approach, however, risks confusing aspects of the Nietzsche legend with what is important in his philosophical work, and many commentators are rightly skeptical of readings derived primarily from biographical anecdotes.

Friedrich Wilhelm Nietzsche was born October 15, 1844, the son of Karl Ludwig and Franziska Nietzsche. Karl Ludwig Nietzsche was a Lutheran Minister in the small Prussian town of Röcken, near Leipzig. When young Friedrich was not quite five, his father died of a brain hemorrhage, leaving Franziska, Friedrich, a three-year old daughter, Elisabeth, and an infant son. Friedrich’s brother died unexpectedly shortly thereafter (reportedly, the legend says, fulfilling Friedrich’s dream foretelling of the tragedy). These events left young Friedrich the only male in a household that included his mother, sister, paternal grandmother and an aunt, although Friedrich drew upon the paternal guidance of Franziska’s father. Young Friedrich also enjoyed the camaraderie of a few male playmates.

Upon the loss of Karl Ludwig, the family took up residence in the relatively urban setting of Naumburg, Saxony. Friedrich gained admittance to the prestigious Schulpforta, where he received Prussia’s finest preparatory education in the Humanities, Theology, and Classical Languages. Outside school, Nietzsche founded a literary and creative society with classmates including Paul Deussen (who was later to become a prominent scholar of Sanskrit and Indic Studies). In addition, Nietzsche played piano, composed music, and read the works of Emerson and the poet Friedrich Hölderlin, who was relatively unknown at the time.

In 1864 Nietzsche entered the University of Bonn, spending the better part of that first year unproductively, joining a fraternity and socializing with old and new acquaintances, most of whom would fall out of his life once he regained his intellectual focus. By this time he had also given up Theology, dashing his mother’s hopes of a career in the ministry for him. Instead, he choose the more humanistic study of classical languages and a career in Philology. In 1865 he followed his major professor, Friedrich Ritschl, from Bonn to the University of Leipzig and dedicated himself to the studious life, establishing an extracurricular society there devoted to the study of ancient texts. Nietzsche’s first contribution to this group was an essay on the Greek poet, Theognis, and it drew the attention of Professor Ritschl, who was so impressed that he published the essay in his academic journal, Rheinisches Museum. Other published writings by Nietzsche soon followed, and by 1868 (after a year of obligatory service in the Prussian military), young Friedrich was being promoted as something of a “phenomenon” in classical scholarship by Ritschl, whose esteem and praise landed Nietzsche a position as Professor of Greek Language and Literature at the University of Basel in Switzerland, even though the candidate had not yet begun writing his doctoral dissertation. The year was 1869 and Friedrich Nietzsche was 24 years old.

At this point in his life, however, Nietzsche was a far cry from the original thinker he would later become, since neither he nor his work had matured. Swayed by public opinion and youthful exuberance, he briefly interrupted teaching in 1870 to join the Prussian military, serving as a medical orderly at the outbreak of the Franco-Prussian War. His service was cut short, however, by severe bouts of dysentery and diphtheria. Back in Basel, his teaching responsibilities at the University and a nearby Gymnasium consumed much of his intellectual and physical energy. He became acquainted with the prominent cultural historian, Jacob Burkhardt, a well-established member of the university faculty. But, the person exerting the most influence on Nietzsche at this point was the artist, Richard Wagner, whom Nietzsche had met while studying in Leipzig. During the first half of the decade, Wagner and his companion, Cosima von Bülow, frequently entertained Nietzsche at Triebschen, their residence near Lake Lucerne, and then later at Bayreuth.

It is commonplace to say that at one time Nietzsche looked to Wagner with the admiration of a dutiful son. This interpretation of their relationship is supported by the fact that Wagner would have been the same age as Karl Ludwig, had the elder Nietzsche been alive. It is also commonplace to note that Nietzsche was in awe of the artist’s excessive displays of a fiery temperament, bravado, ambition, egoism, and loftiness— typical qualities demonstrating “genius” in the nineteenth century. In short, Nietzsche was overwhelmed by Wagner’s personality. A more mature Nietzsche would later look back on this relationship with some regret, although he never denied the significance of Wagner’s influence on his emotional and intellectual path, Nietzsche’s estimation of Wagner’s work would alter considerably over the course of his life. Nonetheless, in light of this relationship, one can easily detect Wagner’s presence in much of Nietzsche’s early writings, particularly in the latter chapters of The Birth of Tragedy and in the first and fourth essays of 1874’s Untimely Meditations. Also, Wagner’s supervision exerted considerable editorial control over Nietzsche’s intellectual projects, leading him to abandon, for example, 1873’s Philosophy in the Tragic Age of the Greeks, which Wagner scorned because of its apparent irrelevance to his own work. Such pressures continued to bridle Nietzsche throughout the so-called early period. He broke free of Wagner’s dominance once and for all in 1877, after a series of emotionally charged episodes. Nietzsche’s fallout with Wagner, who had moved to Bayreuth by this time, led to the publication of 1878’s Human, All-Too Human, one of Nietzsche’s most pragmatic and un-romantic texts—the original title page included a dedication to Voltaire and a quote from Descartes.  If Nietzsche intended to use this text as a way of alienating himself from the Wagnerian circle, he surely succeeded. Upon its arrival in Bayreuth, the text ended this personal relationship with Wagner.

It would be an exaggeration to say that Nietzsche was not developing intellectually during the period, prior to 1877. In fact, figures other than Wagner drew Nietzsche’s interest and admiration. In addition to attending Burkhardt’s lectures at Basel, Nietzsche studied Greek thought from the Pre-Socratics to Plato, and he learned much about the history of philosophy from Friedrich Albert Lange’s massive History of Materialism, which Nietzsche once called “a treasure trove” of historical and philosophical names, dates, and currents of thought. In addition, Nietzsche was taken by the persona of the philosopher Arthur Schopenhauer, which Nietzsche claimed to have culled from close readings of the two-volume magnum opus, The World as Will and Representation.

Nietzsche discovered Schopenhauer while studying in Leipzig. Because his training at Schulpforta had elevated him far above most of his classmates, he frequently skipped lectures at Leipzig in order to devote time to [CE1] Schopenhauer’s philosophy. For Nietzsche, the most important aspect of this philosophy was the figure from which it emanated, representing for him the heroic ideal of a man in the life of thought: a near-contemporary thinker participating in that great and noble “republic of genius,” spanning the centuries of free thinking sages and creative personalities. That Nietzsche could not countenance Schopenhauer’s “ethical pessimism” and its negation of the will was recognized by the young man quite early during this encounter. Yet, even in Nietzsche’s attempts to construct a counter-posed “pessimism of strength” affirming the will, much of Schopenhauer’s thought remained embedded in Nietzsche’s philosophy, particularly during the early period. Nietzsche’s philosophical reliance on “genius”, his cultural-political visions of rank and order through merit, and his self-described (and later self-rebuked) “metaphysics of art” all had Schopenhauerian underpinnings. Also, Birth of Tragedy’s well-known dualism between the cosmological/aesthetic principles of Dionysus and Apollo, contesting and complimenting each other in the tragic play of chaos and order, confusion and individuation, strikes a familiar chord to readers acquainted with Schopenhauer’s description of the world as “will” and “representation.”

Despite these similarities, Nietzsche’s philosophical break with Schopenhauerian pessimism was as real as his break with Wagner’s domineering presence was painful. Ultimately, however, such triumphs were necessary to the development and liberation of Nietzsche as thinker, and they proved to be instructive as Nietzsche later thematized the importance of “self-overcoming” for the project of cultivating a free spirit.

The middle and latter part of the 1870s was a time of great upheaval in Nietzsche’s personal life. In addition to the turmoil with Wagner and related troubles with friends in the artist’s circle of admirers, Nietzsche suffered digestive problems, declining eyesight, migraines, and a variety of physical aliments, rendering him unable to fulfill responsibilities at Basel for months at a time. After publication of Birth of Tragedy, and despite its perceived success in Wagnerian circles for trumpeting the master’s vision for Das Kunstwerk der Zukunft (“The Art Work of the Future”) Nietzsche’s academic reputation as a philologist was effectively destroyed due in large part to the work’s apparent disregard for scholarly expectations characteristic of nineteenth-century philology. Birth of Tragedy was mocked as Zukunfts-Philologie (“Future Philology”) by Wilamowitz-Moellendorff, an up-and-coming peer destined for an illustrious career in Classicism, and even Ritschl characterized it as a work of “megalomania.” For these reasons, Nietzsche had difficulty attracting students. Even before the publication of Birth of Tragedy, he had attempted to re-position himself at Basel in the department of philosophy, but the University apparently never took such an endeavor seriously. By 1878, his circumstances at Basel deteriorated to the point that neither the University nor Nietzsche was very much interested in seeing him continue as a professor there, so both agreed that he should retire with a modest pension [CE2] . He was 34 years  old and now apparently liberated, not only from his teaching duties and the professional discipline he grew to despise, but also from the emotional and intellectual ties that dominated him during his youth. His physical woes, however, would continue to plague him for the remainder of his life.

After leaving Basel, Nietzsche enjoyed a period of great productivity. And, during this time, he was never to stay in one place for long, moving with the seasons, in search of relief for his ailments, solitude for his work, and reasonable living conditions, given his very modest budget. He often spent summers in the Swiss Alps in Sils Maria, near St. Moritz, and winters in Genoa, Nice, or Rappollo on the Mediterranean coast. Occasionally, he would visit family and friends in Naumburg or Basel, and he spent a great deal of time in social discourse, exchanging letters with friends and associates.

In the latter part of the 1880s, Nietzsche’s health worsened, and in the midst of an amazing flourish of intellectual activity which produced On the Genealogy of Morality, Twilight of the Idols, The Anti-Christ, and several other works (including preparation for what was intended to be his magnum opus, a work that editors later titled Will to Power) Nietzsche suffered a complete mental and physical breakdown. The famed moment at which Nietzsche is said to have succumbed irrevocably to his ailments occurred January 3, 1889 in Turin (Torino) Italy, reportedly outside Nietzsche’s apartment in the Piazza Carlos Alberto while embracing a horse being flogged by its owner.

After spending time in psychiatric clinics in Basel and Jena, Nietzsche was first placed in the care of his mother, and then later his sister (who had spent the latter half of the 1880’s attempting to establish a “racially pure” German colony in Paraguay with her husband, the anti-Semitic political opportunist Bernhard Foerster). By the early 1890s, Elisabeth had seized control of Nietzsche’s literary remains, which included a vast amount of unpublished writings. She quickly began shaping his image and the reception of his work, which by this time had already gained momentum among academics such as Georg Brandes. Soon the Nietzsche legend would grow in spectacular fashion among popular readers. From Villa Silberblick, the Nietzsche home in Weimar, Elisabeth and her associates managed Friedrich’s estate, editing his works in accordance with her taste for a populist decorum and occasionally with an ominous political intent that (later researchers agree) corrupted the original thought[CE3] . Unfortunately, Friedrich experienced little of his fame, having never recovered from the breakdown of late 1888 and early 1889. His final years were spent at Villa Silberblick in grim mental and physical deterioration, ending mercifully August 25, 1900. He was buried in Röcken, near Leipzig. Elisabeth spent one last year in Paraguay in 1892-93 before returning to Germany, where she continued to exert influence over the perception of Nietzsche’s work and reputation, particularly among general readers, until her death in 1935. Villa Silberblick stands today as a monument, of sorts, to Friedrich and Elisabeth, while the bulk of Nietzsche’s literary remains is held in the Goethe-Schiller Archiv, also in Weimar.

2. Periodization of Writings

Nietzsche scholars commonly divide his work into periods, usually with the implication that discernable shifts in Nietzsche’s circumstances and intellectual development justify some form of periodization in the corpus. The following division is typical:

(i.) before 1869—the juvenilia

Cautious Nietzsche biographers work to separate the facts of Nietzsche’s life from myth, and while a major part of the Nietzsche legend holds that Friedrich was a precocious child, writings from his youth bear witness to that part of the story. During this time Nietzsche was admitted into the prestigious Gymnasium Schulpforta; he composed music, wrote poetry and plays, and in 1863 produced an autobiography (at the age of 19). He also produced more serious and accomplished works on themes related to philology, literature, and philosophy. By 1866 he had begun contributing articles to a major philological journal, Rheinisches Museum, edited by Nietzsche’s esteemed professor at Bonn and Leipzig, Friedrich Ritschl. With Ritschl’s recommendation, Nietzsche was appointed professor of Greek Language and Literature at the University of Basel in January 1869.

(ii.) 1869-1876--the early period

Nietzsche’s writings during this time reflect interests in philology, cultural criticism, and aesthetics. His inaugural public lecture at Basel in May 1869, “Homer and Classical Philology” brought out aesthetic and scientific aspects of his discipline, portending Nietzsche’s attitudes towards science, art, philology and philosophy. He was influenced intellectually by the philosopher Arthur Schopenhauer and emotionally by the artist Richard Wagner. Nietzsche’s first published book, The Birth of Tragedy, appropriated Schopenhaurian categories of individuation and chaos in an elucidation of primordial aesthetic drives represented by the Greek gods Apollo and Dionysus. This text also included a Wagnerian precept for cultural flourishing: society must cultivate and promote its most elevated and creative types—the artistic genius. In the Preface to a later edition of this work, Nietzsche expresses regret for having attempted to elaborate a “metaphysics of art.” In addition to these themes, Nietzsche’s interest during this period extended to Greek philosophy, intellectual history, and the natural sciences, all of which were significant to the development of his mature thought. Nietzsche’s second book-length project, The Untimely Meditations, contains four essays written from 1873-1876. It is a work of acerbic cultural criticism, encomia to Schopenhauer and Wagner, and an unexpectedly idiosyncratic analysis of the newly developing historical consciousness. A fifth meditation on the discipline of philology is prepared but left unpublished. Plagued by poor health, Nietzsche is released from teaching duties in February 1876 (his affiliation with the university officially ends in 1878 and he is granted a small pension).

(iii.) 1877-1882—the middle period

During this time Nietzsche liberated himself from the emotional grip of Wagner and the artist’s circle of admirers, as well as from those ideas which (as he claims in Ecce Homo) “did not belong” to him in his “nature” (“Human All Too Human: With Two Supplements” 1).  Reworking earlier themes such as tragedy in philosophy, art and truth, and the human exemplar, Nietzsche’s thinking now comes into sharper focus, and he sets out on a philosophical path to be followed the remainder of his productive life. In this period’s three published works Human, All-Too Human (1878-79), Dawn (1881), and The Gay Science (1882), Nietzsche takes up writing in an aphoristic style, which permits exploration of a variety of themes. Most importantly, Nietzsche lays out a plan for  “becoming what one is” through the cultivation of instincts and various cognitive faculties, a plan that requires constant struggle with one’s psychological and intellectual inheritances. Nietzsche discovers that “one thing is needful” for the exemplary human being: to craft an identity from otherwise dissociated events bringing forth the horizons of one’s existence. Self-realization, as it is conceived in these texts, demands the radicalization of critical inquiry with a historical consciousness and then a “retrograde step” back (Human aphorism 20) from what is revealed in such examinations, insofar as these revelations threaten to dissolve all metaphysical realities and leave nothing but the abysmal comedy of existence. A peculiar kind of meaningfulness is thus gained by the retrograde step: it yields a purpose for existence, but in an ironic form, perhaps esoterically and without ground; it is transparently nihilistic to the man with insight, but suitable for most; susceptible to all sorts of suspicion, it is nonetheless necessary and for that reason enforced by institutional powers. Nietzsche calls the one who teaches the purpose of existence a “tragic hero” (GS 1), and the one who understands the logic of the retrograde step a “free spirit.” Nietzsche’s account of this struggle for self-realization and meaning leads him to consider problems related to metaphysics, religion, knowledge, aesthetics, and morality.

(iv.) Post-1882—the later period

Nietzsche transitions into a new period with the conclusion of The Gay Science (Book IV) and his next published work, the novel Thus Spoke Zarathustra, produced in four parts between 1883 and 1885. Also in 1885 he returns to philosophical writing with Beyond Good and Evil. In 1886 he attempts to consolidate his inquiries through self-criticism in Prefaces written for the earlier published works, and he writes a fifth book for The Gay Science. In 1887 he writes On the Genealogy of Morality. In 1888, with failing health, he produces several texts, including The Twilight of the Idols, The Anti-Christ, Ecce Homo, and two works concerning his prior relationship with Wagner. During this period, as with the earlier ones, Nietzsche produces an abundance of materials not published during his lifetime. These works constitute what is referred to as Nietzsche’s Nachlass. (For years this material has been published piecemeal in Germany and translated to English in various collections.) Philosophically, during this period, Nietzsche continues his explorations on morality, truth, aesthetics, history, power, language and identity. For some readers, he appears to be broadening the scope of his ideas to work out a cosmology involving the all encompassing “will to power” and the curiously related and enigmatic “eternal recurrence of the same.” Prior claims regarding the retrograde step are re-thought, apparently in favor of seeking some sort of breakthrough into the “abyss of light” (Zarathustra’s “Before Sunrise”) or in an encounter with “decadence” (“Expeditions of a Untimely Man” 43, in Twilight of the Idols). The intent here seems to be an overcoming or dissolution of metaphysics.  These developments are matters of contention, however, as some commentators maintain that statements regarding Nietzsche’s “cosmological vision” are exaggerated. And, some will even deny that he achieves (nor even attempts) the overcoming described above. Despite such complaints, interpreters of Nietzsche continue to reference these ineffable concepts.

3. Problems of Interpretation

Nietzsche’s work in the beginning was heavily influenced, either positively or negatively, by the events of his young life. His early and on-going interest in the Greeks, for example, can be attributed in part to his Classical education at Schulpforta, for which he was well-prepared as a result of his family’s attempts to steer him into the ministry. Nietzsche’s intense association with Wagner no doubt enhanced his orientation towards the philosophy of Schopenhauer, and it probably promoted his work in aesthetics and cultural criticism. These biographical elements came to bear on Nietzsche’s first major works, while the middle period amounts to a confrontation with many of these influences. In Nietzsche’s later  writings  we find the development of concepts that seem less tangibly related to the biographical events of his life.

Let's outline four of these concepts, but not before adding a word of caution regarding how this outline should be received. Nietzsche asserts in the opening section of Twilight of the Idols that he “mistrusts systematizers” (“Maxims and Arrows” 26), which is taken by some readers to be a declaration of his fundamental stance towards philosophical systems, with the additional inference that nothing resembling such a system must be permitted to stand in interpretations of his thought. Although it would not be illogical to say that Nietzsche mistrusted philosophical systems, while nevertheless building one of his own, some commentators point out two important qualifications. First, the meaning of Nietzsche’s stated “mistrust” in this brief aphorism can and should be treated with caution. In Beyond Good and Evil Nietzsche claims that philosophers today, after millennia of dogmatizing about absolutes, now have a “duty to mistrust” philosophy’s dogmatizing tendencies (BGE 34). Yet, earlier in that same text, Nietzsche  claimed that all philosophical interpretations of nature are acts of will  power (BGE 9) and that his interpretations are subject to the same critique (BGE 22).   In Thus Spoke Zarathustra’s “Of Involuntary Bliss” we find Zarathustra speaking of his own “mistrust,” when he describes the happiness that has come to him in the “blissful hour” of the third part of that book. Zarathustra attempts to chase away this bliss while waiting for the arrival of his unhappiness, but his happiness draws “nearer and nearer to him,” because he does not chase after it. In the next scene we find Zarathustra dwelling in the “light abyss” of the pure open sky, “before sunrise.” What then is the meaning of this “mistrust”? At the very least, we can say that Nietzsche does not intend it to establish a strong and unmovable absolute, a negative-system, from which dogma may be drawn. Nor, possibly, is Nietzsche’s mistrust of systematizers absolutely clear. Perhaps it is a discredit to Nietzsche as a philosopher that he did not elaborate his position more carefully within this tension; or, perhaps such uncertainty has its own ground.  Commentators such as Mueller-Lauter have noticed ambivalence in Nietzsche’s work on this very issue, and it seems plausible that Nietzsche mistrusted systems while nevertheless constructing something like a system countenancing this mistrust. He says something akin to this, after all, in Beyond Good and Evil, where it is claimed that even science’s truths are matters of interpretation, while admitting that this bold claim is also an interpretation and “so much the better” (aphorism 22). For a second cautionary note, many commentators will argue along with Richard Schacht that, instead of building a system, Nietzsche is concerned only with the exploration of problems, and that his kind of philosophy is limited to the interpretation and evaluation of cultural inheritances (1995). Other commentators will attempt to complement this sort of interpretation and, like Löwith, presume that the ground for Nietzsche’s explorations may also be examined. Löwith and others argue that this ground concerns Nietzsche’s encounter with historical nihilism. The following outline should be received, then, with the understanding that Nietzsche’s own iconoclastic nature, his perspectivism, and his life-long projects of genealogical critique and the revaluation of values, lend credence to those anti-foundational readings which seek to emphasize only those exploratory aspects of Nietzsche’s work while refuting even implicit submissions to an orthodox interpretation of “the one Nietzsche” and his “one system of thought.” With this caution, the following outline is offered as one way of grounding Nietzsche’s various explorations.

The four major concepts presented in this outline are:

  • (i)  Nihilism and the Revaluation of Values, which is embodied by a historical event, “the death of God,” and which entails, somewhat problematically, the project of transvaluation;
  • (ii) The Human Exemplar, which takes many forms in Nietzsche’s thought, including the “tragic artist”, the “sage”, the “free spirit”, the “philosopher of the future”, the Übermensch (variously translated in English as “Superman,” “Overman,” “Overhuman,” and the like), and perhaps others (the case could be made, for example, that in Nietzsche’s notoriously self-indulgent and self-congratulatory Ecce Homo, the role of the human exemplar is played by “Mr. Nietzsche” himself);
  • (iii) Will to Power (Wille zur Macht), from a naturalized history of morals and truth developing through subjective feelings of power to a cosmology;
  • (iv)  Eternal Recurrence or Eternal Return (variously in Nietzsche’s work, “die ewige Wiederkunft” or “die ewige Wiederkehr”) of the Same (des Gleich), a solution to the riddle of temporality without purpose.


4. Nihilism and the Revaluation of Values

Although Michael Gillespie makes a strong case that Nietzsche misunderstood nihilism, and in any event Nietzsche’s Dionysianism would be a better place to look for an anti-metaphysical breakthrough in Nietzsche’s corpus (1995, 178), commentators as varied in philosophical orientation as Heidegger and Danto have argued that nihilism is a central theme in Nietzsche’s philosophy. Why is this so? The constellation of Nietzsche’s fundamental concepts moves within his general understanding of modernity’s historical situation in the late nineteenth century. In this respect, Nietzsche’s thought carries out the Kantian project of “critique” by applying the nineteenth century’s developing historical awareness to problems concerning the possibilities of knowledge, truth, and human consciousness. Unlike Kant’s critiques, Nietzsche’s examinations find no transcendental ego, given that even the categories of experience are historically situated and likewise determined. Unlike Hegel’s notion of historical consciousness, however, history for Nietzsche has no inherent teleology. All beginnings and ends, for Nietzsche, are thus lost in a flood of indeterminacy. As early as 1873, Nietzsche was arguing that human reason is only one of many peculiar developments in the ebb and flow of time, and when there are no more rational animals nothing of absolute value will have transpired (“On truth and lies in a non-moral sense”). Some commentators would prefer to consider these sorts of remarks as belonging to Nietzsche’s “juvenilia.” Nevertheless, as late as 1888’s “Reason in Philosophy” from Twilight of the Idols, Nietzsche derides philosophers who would make a “fetish” out of reason and retreat into the illusion of a “de-historicized” world. Such a philosopher is “decadent,” symptomatic of a “declining life”. Opposed to this type, Nietzsche valorizes the “Dionysian” artist whose sense of history affirms “all that is questionable and terrible in existence.”

Nietzsche’s philosophy contemplates the meaning of values and their significance to human existence. Given that no absolute values exist, in Nietzsche’s worldview, the evolution of values on earth must be measured by some other means. How then shall they be understood? The existence of a value presupposes a value-positing perspective, and values are created by human beings (and perhaps other value-positing agents) as aids for survival and growth. Because values are important for the well being of the human animal, because belief in them is essential to our existence, we oftentimes prefer to forget that values are our own creations and to live through them as if they were absolute. For these reasons, social institutions enforcing adherence to inherited values are permitted to create self-serving economies of power, so long as individuals living through them are thereby made more secure and their possibilities for life enhanced. Nevertheless, from time to time the values we inherit are deemed no longer suitable and the continued enforcement of them no longer stands in the service of life. To maintain allegiance to such values, even when they no longer seem practicable, turns what once served the advantage to individuals to a disadvantage, and what was once the prudent deployment of values into a life denying abuse of power. When this happens the human being must reactivate its creative, value-positing capacities and construct new values.

Commentators will differ on the question of whether nihilism for Nietzsche refers specifically to a state of affairs characterizing specific historical moments, in which inherited values have been exposed as superstition and have thus become outdated, or whether Nietzsche means something more than this. It is, at the very least, accurate to say that for Nietzsche nihilism has become a problem by the nineteenth century. The scientific, technological, and political revolutions of the previous two hundred years put an enormous amount of pressure on the old world order. In this environment, old value systems were being dismantled under the weight of newly discovered grounds for doubt. The possibility arises, then, that nihilism for Nietzsche is merely a temporary stage in the refinement of true belief. This view has the advantage of making Nietzsche’s remarks on truth and morality seem coherent from a pragmatic standpoint, in that with this view the problem of nihilism is met when false beliefs have been identified and corrected. Reason is not a value, in this reading, but rather the means by which human beings examine their metaphysical presuppositions and explore new avenues to truth.

Yet, another view will have it that by nihilism Nietzsche is pointing out something even more unruly at work, systemically, in the Western world’s axiomatic orientation. Heidegger, for example, claims that with the problem of nihilism Nietzsche is showing us the essence of Western metaphysics and its system of values (“The Word of Nietzsche: ‘God is dead’”). According to this view, Nietzsche’s philosophy of value, with its emphasis on the value-positing gesture, implies that even the concept of truth in the Western worldview leads to arbitrary determinations of value and political order and that this worldview is disintegrating under the weight of its own internal logic (or perhaps “illogic”). In this reading, the history of truth in the occidental world is the  “history of an error” (Twilight of the Idols), harboring profoundly disruptive antinomies which lead, ultimately, to the undoing of the Western philosophical framework. This kind of systemic flaw is exposed by the historical consciousness of the nineteenth century, which makes the problem of nihilism seem all the more acutely related to Nietzsche’s historical situation. But to relegate nihilism to that situation, according to Heidegger, leaves our thinking of it incomplete.

Heidegger makes this stronger claim with the aid of Nietzsche’s Nachlass. Near the beginning of the aphorisms collected under the title, Will To Power (aphorism 2), we find this note from 1887: “What does nihilism mean? That the highest values devalue themselves The aim is lacking; “why?” finds no answer.”  Here, Nietzsche’s answer regarding the meaning of nihilism has three parts. The first part makes a claim about the logic of values: ultimately, given the immense breadth of time, even “the highest values devalue themselves.”no long t use of such values into an abuse of the longer useful, turns what was once perhaps advan What does this mean?” According to Nietzsche, the conceptual framework known as Western metaphysics was first articulated by Plato, who had pieced together remnants of a declining worldview, borrowing elements from predecessors such as Anaximander, Parmenides, and especially Socrates, in order to overturn a cosmology that had been in play from the days of Homer and which found its fullest and last expression in the thought of Heraclitus. Plato’s framework was popularized by Christianity, which added egalitarian elements along with the virtue of pity. The maturation of Western metaphysics occurs during modernity’s scientific and political revolutions, wherein the effects of its inconsistencies, malfunctions, and mal-development become acute. At this point, according to Nietzsche, “the highest values devalue themselves,” as modernity’s striving for honesty, probity, and courage in the search for truth, those all-important virtues inhabiting the core of scientific progress, strike a fatal blow against the foundational idea of absolutes. Values most responsible for the scientific revolution, however, are also crucial to the metaphysical system that modern science is destroying. Such values are threatening, then, to bring about the destruction of their own foundations. Thus, the highest values are devaluing themselves at the core. Most importantly, the values of honesty, probity, and courage in the search for truth no longer seem compatible with the guarantee, the bestowal, and the bestowing agent of an absolute value. Even the truth of “truth” now falls prey to the workings of nihilism, given that Western metaphysics now appears groundless in this logic.

For some commentators, this line of interpretation leaves Nietzsche’s revaluation of values lost in contradiction. What philosophical ground, after all, could support revaluation if this interpretation were accurate? For this reason, readers such as Clark work to establish a coherent theory of truth in Nietzsche’s philosophy, which can apparently be done by emphasizing various parts of the corpus to the exclusion of others. If, indeed, a workable epistemology may be derived from reading specific passages, and good reasons can be given for prioritizing those passages, then consistent grounds may exist for Nietzsche having leveled a critique of morality. Such readings, however, seem incompatible with Nietzsche’s encounter with historical nihilism, unless nihilism is taken to represent merely a temporary stage in the refinement of Western humanity’s acquisition of knowledge.

With the stronger claim, however, Nietzsche’s critique of the modern situation implies that the “highest values [necessarily] devalue themselves.” Western metaphysics brings about its own disintegration, in working out the implications of its inner logic. Nietzsche’s name for this great and terrible event, capturing popular imagination with horror and disgust, is the “death of God.” Nietzsche acknowledges that a widespread understanding of this event, the “great noon” at which all “shadows of God” will be washed out, is still to come. In Nietzsche’s day, the God of the old metaphysics is still worshiped, of course, and would be worshiped, he predicted, for years to come. But, Nietzsche insisted, in an intellectual climate that demands honesty in the search for truth and proof as a condition for belief, the absence of foundations has already been laid bare. The dawn of a new day had broken, and shadows now cast, though long, were receding by the minute.

The second part of the answer to the question concerning nihilism states that “the aim is lacking.” What does this mean? In Beyond Good and Evil Nietzsche claims that the logic of an existence lacking inherent meaning demands, from an organizational standpoint, a value-creating response, however weak this response might initially be in comparison to how its values are then taken when enforced by social institutions (aphorisms 20-23).  Surveys of various cultures show that humanity’s most indispensable creation, the affirmation of meaning and purpose, lies at the heart of all fundamental values. Nihilism stands not only for that apparently inevitable process by which the highest values devalue themselves. It also stands for that moment of recognition in which human existence appears, ultimately, to be in vain. Nietzsche’s surveys of cultures and their values, his cultural anthropologies, are typically reductive in the extreme, attempting to reach the most important sociopolitical questions as neatly and quickly as possible. Thus, when examining so-called Jewish, Oriental, Roman, or Medieval European cultures Nietzsche asks, “how was meaning and purpose proffered and secured here? How, and for how long, did the values here serve the living? What form of redemption was sought here, and was this form indicative of a healthy life? What may one learn about the creation of values by surveying such cultures?” This version of nihilism then means that absolute aims are lacking and that cultures naturally attempt to compensate for this absence with the creation of goals.

The third part of the answer to the question concerning nihilism states that “‘why?’ finds no answer.” Who is posing the question here? Emphasis is laid on the one who faces the problem of nihilism. The problem of value-positing concerns the one who posits values, and this one must be examined, along with a corresponding evaluation of relative strengths and weaknesses. When, indeed, “why?” finds no answer, nihilism is complete. The danger here is that the value-positing agent might become paralyzed, leaving the call of life’s most dreadful question unanswered. In regards to this danger, Nietzsche’s most important cultural anthropologies examined the Greeks from Homer to the age of tragedy and the “pre-Platonic” philosophers. Here was evidence, Nietzsche believed, that humanity could face the dreadful truth of existence without becoming paralyzed. At every turn, the moment in which the Greek world’s highest values devalued themselves, when an absolute aim was shown to be lacking, the question “why?’ nevertheless called forth an answer. The strength of Greek culture is evident in the gods, the tragic art, and the philosophical concepts and personalities created by the Greeks themselves. Comparing the creativity of the Greeks to the intellectual work of modernity, the tragic, affirmative thought of Heraclitus to the pessimism of Schopenhauer, Nietzsche highlights a number of qualitative differences. Both types are marked by the appearance of nihilism, having been drawn into the inevitable logic of value-positing and what it would seem to indicate. The Greek type nevertheless demonstrates the characteristics of strength by activating and re-intensifying the capacity to create, by overcoming paralysis, by willing a new truth, and by affirming the will. The other type displays a pessimism of weakness, passivity, and weariness—traits typified by Schopenhauer’s life-denying ethics of the will turning against itself. In Nietzsche’s 1888 retrospection on the Birth of Tragedy in Ecce Homo, we read that “Hellenism and Pessimism” would have made a more precise title for the first work, because Nietzsche claims to have attempted to demonstrate how

the Greeks got rid of pessimism—with what they overcame it….Precisely tragedy is the proof that the Greeks were no pessimists: Schopenhauer  blundered in this as he blundered in everything (“The Birth of Tragedy” in Ecce Homo section 1).

From Twilight of the Idols, also penned during that sublime year of 1888, Nietzsche writes that tragedy “has to be considered the decisive repudiation” of pessimism as Schopenhauer understood it:

affirmation of life, even in its strangest and sternest problems, the will to life rejoicing in its own inexhaustibility through the sacrifice of its highest types—that is what I called Dionysian….beyond [Aristotelian] pity and terror, to realize in oneself the eternal joy of becoming—that joy which also encompasses joy in destruction (“What I Owe the Ancients” 5).

Nietzsche concludes the above passage by claiming to be the “last disciple of the philosopher Dionysus” (which by this time in Nietzsche’s thought came to encompass the whole of that movement which formerly distinguished between Apollo and Dionysus). Simultaneously, Nietzsche declares himself, with great emphasis, to be the “teacher of the eternal recurrence.”

The work to overcome pessimism is tragic in a two-fold sense: it maintains a feeling for the absence of ground, while responding to this absence with the creation of something meaningful. This work is also unmodern, according to Nietzsche, since modernity either has yet to ask the question “why?,” in any profound sense or, in those cases where the question has been posed, it has yet to come up with a response. Hence, a pessimism of weakness and an incomplete form of nihilism prevail in the modern epoch. Redemption in this life is denied, while an uncompleted form of nihilism remains the fundamental condition of humanity. Although the logic of nihilism seems inevitable, given the absence of absolute purpose and meaning, “actively” confronting nihilism and completing our historical encounter with it will be a sign of good health and the “increased power of the spirit” (Will to Power aphorism 22). Thus far, however, modernity’s attempts to “escape nihilism” (in turning away) have only served to “make the problem more acute” (aphorism 28). Why, then, this failure? What does modernity lack?

5. The Human Exemplar

How and why do nihilism and the pessimism of weakness prevail in modernity? Again, from the notebook of 1887 (Will to Power, aphorism 27), we find two conditions for this situation:

1. the higher species is lacking, i.e., those whose inexhaustible fertility and power keep up the faith in man….[and] 2. the lower species (‘herd,’ ‘mass,’ ‘society,’) unlearns modesty and blows up its needs into cosmic and metaphysical values. In this way the whole of existence is vulgarized: insofar as the mass is dominant it bullies the exceptions, so they lose their faith in themselves and become nihilists.

With the fulfillment of “European nihilism” (which is no doubt, for Nietzsche, endemic throughout the Western world and anyplace touched by “modernity”), and the death of otherworldly hopes for redemption, Nietzsche imagines two possible responses:  the easy response, the way of the “herd” and “the last man,” or the difficult response, the way of the “exception,” and the Übermensch.

Ancillary to any discussion of the exception, per se, the compatibility of the Übermensch concept with other movements in Nietzsche’s thought, and even the significance that Nietzsche himself placed upon it, has been the subject of intense debate among Nietzsche scholars. The term’s appearance in Nietzsche’s corpus is limited primarily to Thus Spoke Zarathustra and works directly related to this text. Even here, moreover, the Übermensch is only briefly and very early announced in the narrative, albeit with a tremendous amount of fanfare, before fading from explicit consideration. In addition to these problems, there are debates concerning the basic nature of the Übermensch itself, whether “Über-” refers to a transitional movement or a transmogrified state of being, and whether Nietzsche envisioned the possibility of a community of Übermenschen, as opposed to a solitary figure among lesser types. So, what should be made of Nietzsche’s so-called “overman” (or even “superman”) called upon to arrive after the “death of God”?

Whatever else may be said about the Übermensch, Nietzsche clearly had in mind an exemplary figure and an exception among humans, one “whose inexhaustible fertility and power keep up the faith in man.” For some commentators, Nietzsche’s distinction between overman and the last man has political ramifications. The hope for an overman figure to appear would seem to be permissible for one individual, many, or even a social ideal, depending on the culture within which it appears. Modernity, in Nietzsche’s view, is in such a state of decadence that it would be fortunate, indeed, to see the emergence of even one such type, given that modern sociopolitical arrangements are more conducive to creating the egalitarian “last man” who “blinks” at expectations for rank, self-overcoming, and striving for greatness. The last men are “ the most harmful to the species because they preserve their existence as much at the expense of the truth as at the expense of the future” (“Why I am a Destiny” in Ecce Homo 1). Although Nietzsche never lays out a precise political program from these ideas, it is at least clear that theoretical justifications for complacency or passivity are antithetical to his philosophy. What, then, may be said about Nietzsche as political thinker?   Nietzsche’s political sympathies are definitely not democratic in any ordinary way of thinking about that sort of arrangement. Nor are they socialist or  Marxist.

Nietzsche’s political sympathies have been called “aristocratic,” which is accurate enough only if one does not confuse the term with European royalty, landed gentry, old money or the like and if one keeps in mind the original Greek meaning of the term, “aristos,” which meant “the good man, the man with power.” A certain ambiguity exists, for Nietzsche, in the term “good man.” On the one hand, the modern, egalitarian “good man,” the “last man,” expresses hostility for those types willing to impose measures of rank and who would dare to want greatness and to strive for it. Such hostilities are born out of ressentiment and inherited from Judeo-Christian moral value systems. (Beyond Good and Evil 257-260 and On the Genealogy of Morals essay 1). “Good” in this sense is opposed to “evil,” and the “good man” is the one whose values support the “herd” and whose condemnations are directed at those whose thoughts and actions might disrupt the complacent normalcy of modern life. On the other hand, the kind of “good man” who might overcome the weak pessimism of “herd morality,” the man of strength, a man to confront nihilism, and thus a true benefactor to humanity, would be decidedly “unmodern” and “out of season.” Only such a figure would “keep up the faith in man.” For these reasons, some commentators have found in Nietzsche an existentialist program for the heroic individual dissociated in varying degrees from political considerations. Such readings however ignore or discount Nietzsche’s interest in historical processes and the unavoidable inference that although Nietzsche’s anti-egalitarianism might lead to questionably “unmodern” political conclusions, hierarchy nevertheless implies association.

The distinction between the good man of active power and the other type also points to ambiguity in the concept of freedom. For the hopeless, human freedom is conceived negatively in the “freedom from” restraints, from higher expectations, measures of rank, and the striving for greatness. While the higher type, on the other hand, understands freedom positively in the “freedom for” achievement, for revaluations of values, overcoming nihilism, and self-mastery.

Nietzsche frequently points to such exceptions as they have appeared throughout history—Napoleon is one of his favorite examples. In modernity, the emergence of such figures seems possible only as an isolated event, as a flash of lightening from the dark cloud of humanity. Was there ever a culture, in contrast to modernity, which saw these sorts of higher types emerge in congress as a matter of expectation and design? Nietzsche’s early philological studies on the Greeks, such as Philosophy in the Tragic Age of the Greeks, The Pre-Platonic Philosophers, “Homer on Competition,” and “The Greek State,” concur that, indeed, the ancient world before Plato produced many exemplary human beings, coming forth independently of each other but “hewn from the same stone,” made possible by the fertile cultural milieu, the social expectation of greatness, and opportunities to prove individual merit in various competitive arenas. Indeed, Greek athletic contests, festivals of music and tragedy, and political life reflected, in Nietzsche’s view, a general appreciation for competition, rank, ingenuity, and the dynamic variation of formal structures of all sorts. Such institutions thereby promoted the elevation of human exemplars. Again, the point must be stressed here that the historical accuracy of Nietzsche’s interpretation of the Greeks is no more relevant to his philosophical schemata than, for example, the actual signing of a material document is to a contractarian political theory. What is important for Nietzsche, throughout his career, is the quick evaluation of social order and heirarchies, made possible for the first time in the nineteenth century by the newly developed “historical sense” (BGE 224) through which Nietzsche draws sweeping conclusions regarding, for example, the characteristics of various moral and religious epochs (BGE 32 and 55), which are themselves pre-conditioned by the material origins of consciousness, from which a pre-human animal acquires the capacity (even the “right”) to make promises and develops into the “sovereign individual” who then bears responsibility for his or her actions and thoughts (GM II.2).

Like these rather ambitious conclusions, Nietzsche’s valorization of the Greeks is partly derived from empirical evidence and partly confected in myth, a methodological concoction that Nietzsche draws from his philological training. If the Greeks, as a different interpretation would have them, bear little resemblance to Nietzsche’s reading, such a difference would have little relevance to Nietzsche’s fundamental thoughts. Later Nietzsche is also clear that his descriptions of the Greeks should not be taken programmatically as a political vision for the future (see for example GS 340).

The “Greeks” are one of Nietzsche’s best exemplars of hope against a meaningless existence, hence his emphasis on the Greek world’s response to the “wisdom of Silenus” in Birth of Tragedy. (ch. 5). If the sovereign individual represents history’s “ripest fruit”, the most recent millennia have created, through rituals of revenge and punishment, a “bad conscience.” The human animal thereby internalizes material forces into feelings of guilt and duty, while externalizing a spirit thus created with hostility towards existence itself (GM II.21). Compared to this typically Christian manner of forming human experiences, the Greeks deified “the animal in man” and thereby kept “bad conscience at bay” (GM II.23).

In addition to exemplifying the Greeks in the early works, Nietzsche lionizes the “artist-genius” and the “sage;” during the middle period he writes confidently, at first, and then longingly about the “scientist,” the “philosopher of the future,” and the “free spirit;” Zarathustra’s decidedly sententious oratory heralds the coming of the Übermensch; the periods in which “revaluation” comes to the fore finds value in the destructive influences of the “madman,” the “immoralist,” the “buffoon,” and even the “criminal.” Finally, Nietzsche’s last works reflect upon his own image, as the “breaker of human history into two,” upon “Mr. Nietzsche,” the “anti-Christian,” the self-anointed clever writer of great books, the creator of Zarathustra, the embodiment of human destiny and humanity’s greatest benefactor: “only after me,” Nietzsche claims in Ecce Homo, “is it possible to hope again” (“Why I am a Destiny” 1). It should be cautioned that important differences exist in the way Nietzsche conceives of each of these various figures, differences that reflect the development of Nietzsche’s philosophical work throughout the periods of his life. For this reason, none of these exemplars should be confused for the others. The bombastic “Mr. Nietzsche” of Ecce Homo is no more the “Übermensch” of Thus Spoke Zarathustra, for example, than the “Zarathustra” character is a “pre-Platonic philosopher” or the alienated, cool, sober, and contemptuous “scientist” is a “tragic artist,” although these figures will frequently share characteristics. Yet, a survey of these exceptions shows that Nietzsche’s philosophy, in his own estimation, needs the apotheosis of a human exemplar, perhaps to keep the search for meaning and redemption from abdicating the earth in metaphysical retreat, perhaps to avert the exhaustion of human creativity, to reawaken the instincts, to inspire the striving for greatness, to remind us that “this has happened once and is therefore a possibility,” or perhaps simply to bestow the “honey offering” of a very useful piece of folly. This need explains the meaning of the parodic fourth book of Zarathustra, which opens with the title character reflecting on the whole of his teachings: “I am he…who once bade himself, and not in vain: ‘Become what you are!’” The subtitle of Nietzsche’s autobiographical Ecce Homo, “How One Becomes What One Is,” strikes a similar chord.

6. Will to Power

The exemplar expresses hope not granted from metaphysical illusions. After sharpening the critique of art and genius during the positivistic period, Nietzsche seems more cautious about heaping praise upon specific historical figures and types, but even when he could no longer find an ideal exception, he nevertheless deemed it requisite to fabricate one in myth. Whereas exceptional humans of the past belong to an exalted “republic of genius,” those of the future, those belonging to human destiny, embody humanity’s highest hopes. As a result of this development, some commentators will emphasize the “philosophy of the future” as one of Nietzsche’s most important ideas. Work pursued in service of the future constitutes for Nietzsche an earthly form of redemption. Yet, exemplars of type, whether in the form of isolated individuals like Napoleon, or of whole cultures like the Greeks, are not caught up in petty historical politics or similar mundane endeavors. According to Nietzsche in Twilight of the Idols, their regenerative powers are necessary for the work of interpreting the meaning and sequence of historical facts.

My Conception of the genius—Great men, like great epochs, are explosive material in whom tremendous energy has been accumulated; their prerequisite has always been, historically and psychologically, that a protracted assembling, accumulating, economizing and preserving has preceded them—that there has been no explosion for a long time. If the tension in the mass has grown too great the merest accidental stimulus suffices to call the “genius,” the “deed,” the great destiny, into the world. Of what account then are circumstances, the epoch, the Zeitgeist, public opinion!...Great human beings are necessary, the epoch in which they appear is accidental… (“Expeditions of an Untimely Man,” 44).

It is with this understanding of the “great man” that Nietzsche, in Ecce Homo, proclaims even himself a great man, “dynamite,”“breaking the history of humanity in two” (“Why I am a Destiny” 1 and 8). A human exemplar, interpreted affirmatively in service of a hopeful future, is a “great event” denoting qualitative differences amidst the play of historical determinations. Thus, it belongs, in this reading, to Nietzsche’s cosmological vision of an indifferent nature marked occasionally by the boundary-stones of noble and sometimes violent uprisings.

To what extent is Nietzsche entitled to such a vision? Unlike nihilism, pessimism, and the death of God, which are historically, scientifically, and sometimes logically derived, Nietzsche’s “yes-saying” concepts seem to be derived from intuition, although Nietzsche will frequently support even these great hopes with bits of inductive reasoning. Nietzsche attempts to describe the logical structure of great events, as if a critical understanding of them pertains to their recurrence in modernity: great men have a “historical and psychological prerequisite.” Historically, there must be a time of waiting and gathering energy, as we find, for example, in the opening scene of Zarathustra. The great man and the great deed belong to a human destiny, one that emerges in situations of crisis and severe want. Psychologically, they are the effects of human energy stored and kept dormant for long periods of time in dark clouds of indifference. Primal energy gathers to a point before a cataclysmic event, like a chemical reaction with an electrical charge, unleashes some decisive, episodic force on all humanity. From here, the logic unfolds categorically: all great events, having occurred, are possibilities. All possibilities become necessities, given an infinite amount of time. Perhaps understanding this logic marks a qualitative difference in the way existence is understood. Perhaps this qualitative difference will spark the revaluation of values. When a momentous event takes place, the exception bolts from the cloud of normalcy as a point of extreme difference. In such ways, using this difference as a reference, as a “boundary-stone” on the river of eternal becoming, the meaning of the past is once again determined and the course of the future is set for a while, at least until a coming epoch unleashes the next great transvaluative event. Conditions for the occurrence of such events, and for the event of grasping this logic itself, are conceptualized, cosmologically in this reading, under the appellation “will to power.”

Before developing this reading further, it should be noted some commentators argue that the cosmological interpretation of will to power makes too strong a claim and that the extent of will to power’s domain ought to be limited to what the idea might explain as a theory of moral psychology, as the principle of an anthropology regarding the natural history of morals, or as a response to evolutionary theories placed in the service of utility. Such commentators will maintain that Nietzsche either in no way intends to construct a new meta-theory, or if he does then such intentions are mistaken and in conflict with his more prescient insights. Indeed, much evidence exists to support each of these positions. As an enthusiastic reader of the French Moralists of the eighteenth century, Nietzsche held the view that all human actions are motivated by the desire “to increase the feeling of power” (GS 13). This view seems to make Nietzsche’s insights regarding moral psychology akin to psychological egoism and would thus make doubtful the popular notion that Nietzsche advocated something like an egoistic ethic. Nevertheless, with this bit of moral psychology, a debate exists among commentators concerning whether Nietzsche intends to make dubious morality per se or whether he merely endeavors to expose those life-denying ways of moralizing inherited from the beginning of Western thought. Nietzsche, at the very least, is not concerned with divining origins. He is interested, rather, in measuring the value of what is taken as true, if such a thing can be measured. For Nietzsche, a long, murky, and thereby misunderstood history has conditioned the human animal in response to physical, psychological, and social necessities (GM II) and in ways that have created additional needs, including primarily the need to believe in a purpose for its very existence (GS 1). This ultimate need may be uncritically engaged, as happens with the incomplete nihilism of those who wish to remain in the shadow of metaphysics and with the laisser aller of the last man who overcomes dogmatism by making humanity impotent (BGE 188). On the other hand, a critical engagement with history is attempted in Nietzsche’s genealogies, which may enlighten the historical consciousness with a sort of transparency regarding the drive for truth and its consequences for determining the human condition. In the more critical engagement, Nietzsche attempts to transform the need for truth and reconstitute the truth drive in ways that are already incredulous towards the dogmatizing tendency of philosophy and thus able to withstand the new suspicions (BGE 22 and 34). Thus, the philosophical exemplar of the future stands in contrast, once again, to the uncritical man of the nineteenth century whose hidden metaphysical principles of utility and comfort fail to complete the overcoming of nihilism (Ecce Homo, “Why I am a Destiny” 4). The question of whether Nietzsche’s transformation of physical and psychological need with a doctrine of the will to power, in making an affirmative principle out of one that has dissolved the highest principles hitherto, simply replaces one metaphysical doctrine with another, or even expresses completely all that has been implicit in metaphysics per se since its inception continues to draw the interest of Nietzsche commentators today. Perhaps the radicalization of will to power in this way amounts to no more than an account of this world to the exclusion of any other. At any rate, the exemplary type, the philosophy of the future, and will to power comprise aspects of Nietzsche’s affirmative thinking. When the egoist’s “I will” becomes transparent to itself a new beginning is thereby made possible. Nietzsche thus attempts to bring forward precisely that kind of affirmation which exists in and through its own essence, insofar as will to power as a principle of affirmation is made possible by its own destructive modalities which pulls back the curtain on metaphysical illusions and dogma founded on them.

The historical situation that conditions Nietzsche’s will to power involves not only the death of God and the reappearance of pessimism, but also the nineteenth century’s increased historical awareness, and with it the return of the ancient philosophical problem of emergence. How does the exceptional, for example, begin to take shape in the ordinary, or truth in untruth, reason in un-reason, social order and law in violence, a being in becoming? The variation and formal emergence of each of these states must, according to Nietzsche, be understood as a possibility only within a presumed sphere of associated events. One could thus also speak of the “emergence,” as part of this sphere, of a given form’s disintegration. Indeed, the new cosmology must account for such a fate. Most importantly, the new cosmology must grant meaning to this eternal recurrence of emergence and disintegration without, however, taking vengeance upon it. This is to say that in the teaching of such a worldview, the “innocence of becoming” must be restored.  The problem of emergence attracted Nietzsche’s interest in the earliest writings, but he apparently began to conceptualize it in published texts during the middle period, when his work freed itself from the early period’s “metaphysics of aesthetics.” The opening passage from 1878’s Human, All Too Human gives some indication of how Nietzsche’s thinking on this ancient problem begins to take shape:

Chemistry of concepts and feelings. In almost all respects, philosophical problems today are again formulated as they were two thousand years ago: how can something arise from its opposite….? Until now, metaphysical philosophy has overcome this difficulty by denying the origin of the one from the other, and by assuming for the more highly valued things some miraculous origin…. Historical philosophy, on the other hand, the very youngest of all philosophical methods, which can no longer be even conceived of as separate from the natural sciences, has determined in isolated cases (and will probably conclude in all of them) that they are not opposites, only exaggerated to be so by the metaphysical view….As historical philosophy explains it, there exists, strictly considered, neither a selfless act nor a completely disinterested observation: both are merely sublimations. In them the basic element appears to be virtually dispersed and proves to be present only to the most careful observer. (Human, All Too Human, 1)

It is telling that Human begins by alluding to the problem of “emergence” as it is brought to light again by the “historical philosophical method.” A decidedly un-scientific “metaphysical view,” by comparison, looks rather for miraculous origins in support of the highest values. Next, in an unexpected move, Nietzsche relates the general problem of emergence to two specific issues, one concerning morals (“selfless acts”) and the other, knowledge—which is taken to include judgment (“disinterested observations”): “in them the basic element appears to be virtually dispersed” and discernable “only to the most careful observer.”

The logical structure of emergence, here, appears to have been borrowed from Hegel and, to be sure, one could point to many Hegelian traces in Nietzsche’s thought. But previously in 1874’s “On the Uses and Disadvantages of History for Life,” from Untimely Meditations, Nietzsche had steadfastly refuted the dialectical logic of a “world historical process,” the Absolute Idea, and cunning reason. What, then, is “the basic element”, dispersed in morals and knowledge? How is it dispersed so that only the careful observer can detect it? The most decisive moment in Nietzsche’s development of a cosmology seems to have occurred when Nietzsche plumbed the surface of his early studies on the pathos and social construction of truth to discover a more prevalent feeling, one animating all socially relevant acts. In Book One of the The Gay Science (certainly one of the greatest works in whole corpus) Nietzsche, in the role of “careful observer,” identifies, with a bit of moral psychology, the one motive spurring all such acts:

On the doctrine of the feeling of power. Benefiting and hurting others are ways of exercising one’s power upon others: that is all one desires in such cases…. Whether benefiting or hurting others involves sacrifices for us does not affect the ultimate value of our actions. Even if we offer our lives, as martyrs do for their church, this is a sacrifice that is offered for our desire for power or for the purpose of preserving our feeling of power. Those who feel “I possess Truth”—how many possessions would they not abandon in order to save this feeling!...Certainly the state in which we hurt others is rarely as agreeable, in an unadulterated way, as that in which we benefit others; it is a sign that we are still lacking power, or it shows a sense of frustration in the face of this poverty….(aphorism 13).

The “ultimate value” of our actions, even concerning those intended to pursue or preserve “truth,” are not measured by the goodness we bring others, notwithstanding the fact that intentionally harmful acts will be indicative of a desperate want of power. Nietzsche, here, asserts the significance of enhancing the feeling of power, and with this aphorism from 1882 we are on the way to seeing how “the feeling of power” will replace, for Nietzsche, otherworldly measures of value, as we read in finalized form in the second aphorism of 1888’s The Anti-Christ:

What is good?—All that heightens the feeling of power, the will to power, power itself in man. What is bad?—All that proceeds from weakness.  What is happiness?—The feeling that power increases—that a resistance is overcome.

No otherworldly measures exist, for Nietzsche. Yet, one should not conclude from this absence of a transcendental measure that all expressions of power are qualitatively the same. Certainly, the possession of a Machiavellian virtù will find many natural advantages in this world, but Nietzsche locates the most important aspect of “overcoming resistance” in self-mastery and self-commanding. In Zarathustra’s chapter, “Of Self-Overcoming,” all living creatures are said to be obeying something, while “he who cannot obey himself will be commanded. That is the nature of living creatures.” It is important to note the disjunction: one may obey oneself or one may not. Either way, one will be commanded, but the difference is qualitative. Moreover, “commanding is more difficult than obeying” (BGE 188 repeats this theme). Hence, one will take the easier path, if unable to command, choosing instead to obey the directions of another. The exception, however, will command and obey the healthy and self-mastering demands of a willing self. But why, we might ask, are all living things beholden to such commanding and obeying? Where is the proof of necessity here? Zarathustra answers:

Listen to my teaching, you wisest men! Test in earnest whether I have crept into the heart of life itself and down to the roots of its heart! Where I found a living creature, there I found will to power; and even in the will of the servant, I found the will to be master (Z “Of the Self-Overcoming”).

Here, apparently, Nietzsche’s doctrine of the feeling of power has become more than an observation on the natural history and psychology of morals. The “teaching” reaches into the heart of life, and it says something absolute about obeying and commanding. But what is being obeyed, on the cosmological level, and what is being commanded? At this point, Zarathustra passes on a secret told to him by life itself: “behold [life says], I am that which must overcome itself again and again…And you too, enlightened man, are only a path and a footstep of my will: truly, my will to power walks with the feet of your will to truth.” We see here that a principle, will to power, is embodied by the human being’s will to truth, and we may imagine it taking other forms as well. Reflecting on this insight, for example, Zarathustra claims to have solved “the riddle of the hearts” of the creator of values: “you exert power with your values and doctrines of good and evil, you assessors of values….but a mightier power and a new overcoming grow from out of your values…” That mightier power growing in and through the embodiment and expression of human values is will to power.

It is important not to disassociate will to power, as a cosmology, from the human being’s drive to create values. To be sure, Nietzsche is still saying that the creation of values expresses a desire for power, and the first essay of 1887’s On the Genealogy of Morality returns to this simple formula. Here, Nietzsche appropriates a well-known element of Hegel’s Phenomenology, the structural movement of thought between basic types called “masters and slaves.” This appropriation has the affect of emphasizing the difference between Nietzsche’s own historical “genealogies” and that of Hegel’s “dialectic” (as is worked out in Deleuze’s study of Nietzsche). Master and slave moralities, the truths of which are confirmed independently by feelings that power has been increased, are expressions of the human being’s will to power in qualitatively different states of health. The former is a consequence of strength, cheerful optimism and naiveté, while the latter stems from impotency, pessimism, cunning and, most famously, ressentiment, the creative reaction of a “bad conscience” coming to form as it turns against itself in hatred. The venom of slave morality is thus directed outwardly in ressentiment and inwardly in bad conscience. Differing concepts of “good,” moreover, belong to master and slave value systems. Master morality complements its good with the designation, “bad,” understood to be associated with the one who is inferior, weak, and cowardly. For slave morality, on the other hand, the designation, “good” is itself the complement of “evil,” the primary understanding of value in this scheme, associated with the one possessing superior strength. Thus, the “good man” in the unalloyed form of “master morality” will be the “evil man,” the man against whom ressentiment is directed, in the purest form of “slave morality.” Nietzsche is careful to add, at least in Beyond Good and Evil, that all modern value systems are constituted by compounding, in varying degrees, these two basic elements. Only a “genealogical” study of how these modern systems came to form will uncover the qualitative strengths and weaknesses of any normative judgment.

The language and method of The Genealogy hearken back to The Gay Science’s “doctrine of the feeling of power.” But, as we have seen, in the period between 1882 and 1887, and from out of the psychological-historical description of morality, truth, and the feeling of power, Nietzsche has given agency to the willing as such that lives in and through the embrace of power, and he generalizes the willing agent in order to include “life” and “the world” and the principle therein by which entities emerge embodied. The ancient philosophical problem of emergence is resolved, in part, with the cosmology of a creative, self-grounding, self-generating, sustaining and enhancing will to power. Such willing, most importantly, commands, which at the same time is an obeying: difference emerges from out of indifference and overcomes it, at least for a while. Life, in this view, is essentially self-overcoming, a self-empowering power accomplishing more power to no other end. In a notebook entry from 1885, Will to Power’s aphorism 1067, Nietzsche’s cosmological intuitions take flight:

And do you know what “the world” is to me? Shall I show it to you in my mirror? This world: a monster of energy, without beginning, without end…as force throughout, as a play of forces and waves of forces…a sea of forces flowing and rushing together, eternally changing and eternally flooding back with tremendous years of recurrence…out of the play of contradictions back to the joy of concord, still blessing itself as that which must return eternally, as a becoming that knows no satiety, no disgust, no weariness; this my Dionysian world of the eternally self-creating, the eternally self-destroying, this mystery world of the two-fold voluptuous delight, my “beyond good and evil,” without goal, unless the joy of the circle is itself a goal….This world is the will to power—and nothing besides! And you yourselves are also this will to power—and nothing besides!

Nietzsche discovers, here, the words to articulate one of his most ambitious concepts. The will to power is now described in terms of eternal and world-encompassing creativity and destructiveness, thought over the expanse of “tremendous years” and in terms of “recurrence,” what Foucault has described as the “play of domination” (1971). In some respects Nietzsche has indeed rediscovered the temporal structure of Heraclitus’ child at play, arranging toys in fanciful constructions of what merely seems like everything great and noble, before tearing down this structure and building again on the precipice of a new mishap. To live in this manner, according to Nietzsche in The Gay Science, to affirm this kind of cosmology and its form of eternity, is to “live dangerously” and to “love fate” (amor fati).

In spite of the positivistic methodology of The Genealogy, beneath the surface of this natural history of morals, will to power pumps life into the heart of both master and slave conceptual frameworks. Moreover, will to power stands as a necessary condition for all value judgments. How, one might ask, are these cosmological intuitions derived? How is knowledge of both will to power and its eternally recurring play of creation and destruction grounded? If they are to be understood poetically, then the question “why?” is misplaced (Zarathustra, “Of Poets”). Logically, with respect to knowledge, Nietzsche insists that principles of perception and judgment evolve co-dependently with consciousness, in response to physical necessities. The self is organized and brought to stand within the body and by the stimuli received there. This means that all principles are transformations of stimuli and interpretations thereupon: truth is “a mobile army of metaphors” which the body forms before the mind begins to grasp. Let us beware, Nietzsche cautions, of saying that the world possesses any sort of order or coherence without these interpretations (GS 109), even to the extent that Nietzsche himself conceives will to power as the way of all things. If all principles are interpretive gestures, by the logic of Nietzsche’s new cosmology, the will to power must also be interpretive (BGE 22). One aspect of the absence of absolute order is that interpretive gestures are necessarily called-forth for the establishment of meaning. A critical requirement of this interpretive gesture becoming transparent is that the new interpretation must knowingly affirm that all principles are grounded in interpretation. According to Nietzsche, such reflexivity does not discredit his cosmology: “so much the better,” since will to power, through Nietzsche’s articulation, emerges as the thought that now dances playfully and lingers for a while in the midst of what Vattimo might call a “weakened” (and weakening) “ontology” of indifference. The human being is thereby “an experimental animal” (GM II). Its truths have the seductive power of the feminine (BGE 1); while Nietzsche’s grandest visions are oriented by the “experimental” or “tempter” god, the one later Nietzsche comes to identify with the name Dionysus (BGE 295).

The philosopher of the future will posses a level of critical awareness hitherto unimagined, given that his interpretive gestures will be recognized as such. Yet, a flourishing life will still demand, one might imagine, being able to suspend, hide, or forget—at the right moments—the creation of values, especially the highest values. Perhaps the cartoonish, bombastic language of The Genealogy’s master and slave morality, to point to an example, which was much more soberly discussed in the previous year’s Beyond Good and Evil, is employed esoterically by Nietzsche for the rhetorical effect of producing a grand and spectacular diversion, hiding the all-important creative gesture that brought forth the new cosmology as a supreme value: “This world is the will to power and nothing besides!—And you yourselves are also this will to power--and nothing besides!” With this teaching, Nietzsche leaves underdeveloped many obvious themes, such as how the world’s non-animate matter may (or may not) be involved with will to power or whether non-human life-forms take part fully and equally in the world’s movement of forces. To have a perspective, for Nietzsche, seems sufficient for participating in will to power, but does this mean that non-human animals, which certainly seem to have perspectives, and without question participate in the living of life, have the human being’s capacity (or any capacity for that matter) to command themselves? Or, do trees and other forms of vegetation? Apparently, they do not. Such problems involve, again, the question of freedom, which interests Nietzsche primarily in the positive form. Of more importance to Nietzsche is that which pertains solely to the human being’s marshalling of forces but, even here (or perhaps especially here), a hierarchy of differences may be discerned. Some human forms of participation in will to power are noble, others ignoble. But, concerning these sorts of activities, Nietzsche stresses in Beyond Good and Evil (aphorism 9) the difference between his own cosmology, which at times seems to re-establish the place of nobility in nature, and the “stoic” view, which asserts the oneness of humanity with divine nature:

“According to nature” you want to live? Oh you noble Stoics, what deceptive words these are! Imagine a being like nature, wasteful beyond measure, indifferent beyond measure, without purposes and consideration, without mercy and justice, fertile and desolate and uncertain at the same time; imagine indifference itself as a power—how could you live according to this indifference? Living—is that not precisely wanting to be other than this nature? Is not livingestimating, preferring, being unjust, being limited, wanting to be different? ….But this is an ancient, eternal story: what formerly happened with the Stoics still happens today, too, as soon as any philosophy begins to believe in itself. It always creates the world in its own image; it cannot do otherwise. Philosophy is this tyrannical drive itself; the most spiritual will to power, to the “creation of  the world,” to the causa prima.

Strauss claims that here Nietzsche is replacing “divine nature” and its egalitarian coherence with “noble nature” and its expression of hierarchies, the condition for which is difference, per se, emerging in nature from indifference (1983). Other commentators have suggested that Nietzsche, here, betrays all of philosophy, lacking any sense of decency with this daring expose—that what is left after the expression of such a forbidden truth is no recourse to meaning.

The most generalized form of the philosophical problem of emergence and disintegration, of the living, valuing, wanting to be different, willing power, is described here in terms of the difference-creating gesture embodied by the human being’s essential work, its “creation of the world” and first causes. Within nature, one might say, energy disperses and accumulates in various force-points: nature’s power to create these force-points is radically indifferent, and this indifference towards what has been created also characterizes its power. Periodically, something exceptional is thrust out from its opposite, given that radical indifference is indifferent even towards itself (if one could speak of ontological conditions in such a representative tone, which Nietzsche certainly does from time to time). Nature is disturbed, and the human being, having thus become aware of its own identity and of others, works towards preserving itself by tying things down with definitions; enhancing itself, occasionally, by loosening the fetters of old, worn-out forms; creating and destroying in such patterns, so as to make humanity and even nature appear to conform to some bit of tyranny. From within the logic of will to power, narrowly construed, human meaning is thus affirmed. “But to what end?” one might ask. To no end, Nietzsche would answer. Here, the more circumspect view could be taken, as is found in Twilight of the Idol’s “The Four Great Errors”: “One is a piece of fate, one belongs to the whole, one is in the whole, there exist nothing which could judge, measure, compare, condemn our being, for that would be to judge, measure, compare, condemn the whole….But nothing exists apart from the whole!” Nietzsche conceptualizes human fate, then, in his most extreme vision of will to power, as being fitted to a whole, “the world,” which is itself “nothing besides” a “monster of energy, without beginning, without end…eternally changing and eternally flooding back with tremendous years of recurrence.” In such manner, will to power expresses itself not only through the embodiment of humanity, its exemplars, and the constant revaluation of values, but also in time. Dasein, for Nietzsche, is suspended on the cross between these ontological movements—between an in/different playing of destruction/creation—and time. But, what temporal model yields the possibility for these expressions? How does Nietzsche’s experimental philosophy conceptualize time?

7. Eternal Recurrence

The world’s eternally self-creating, self-destroying play is conditioned by time. Yet, Nietzsche’s skepticism concerning what can be known of telos, indeed his refutation of an absolute telos independent of human fabrication, demands a view of time that differs from those that place willing, purposiveness, and efficient causes in the service of goals, sufficient reason, and causa prima. Another formulation of this problem might ask, “what is the history of willing, if not the demonstration of progress and/or decay?”

Nietzsche’s solution to the riddle of time, nevertheless, radicalizes the Christian concept of eternity, combining a bit of simple observation and sure reasoning with an intuition that produces curious, but innovative results. The solution takes shape as Nietzsche fills the temporal horizons of past and future with events whose denotations have no permanent tether. Will to power, the Heraclitean cosmic-child, plays-on without preference to outcomes. Within the two-fold limit of this horizon, disturbances emerge from their opposites, but one cannot evaluate them, absolutely, because judgment implicates participation in will to power, in the ebb and flow of events constituting time. The objective perspective is not possible, since the whole consumes all possibilities, giving form to and destroying all that has come to fulfillment. Whatever stands in this flux, does so in the midst of the whole, but only for a while. It disturbs the whole, but does so as part of the whole. As such, whatever stands is measured, on the one hand, by the context its emergence creates. On the other hand, whatever stands is immeasurable, by virtue of the whole, the logic of which would determine this moment to have occurred in the never-ending flux of creation and destruction. Even to say that particular events seem better or worse suited to the functionality of the whole, or to its stability, or its health, or that an event may be measured absolutely by its fitted-ness in some other way, presupposes a standpoint that Nietzsche’s cosmology will not allow. One is left only to describe material occurrences and to intuit the passing of time.

The second part of Nietzsche’s solution to the riddle of time reasons that the mere observation of an occurrence, whether thought to be a simple thing or a more complex event, is enough to demonstrate the occurrence’s possibility. If “something” has happened, then its happening, naturally, must have been possible. Each simple thing or complex event is linked, inextricably, to a near infinite number of others, also demonstrating the possibilities of their happenings. If all of these possibilities could be presented in such a way as to account for their relationships and probabilities, as for example on a marvelously complex set of dice, then it could be shown that each of these possibilities will necessarily occur, and re-occur, given that the game of dice continues a sufficient length of time.

Next, Nietzsche considers the nature of temporal limits and duration. He proposes that no beginning or end of time can be determined, absolutely, in thought. No matter what sort of temporal limits are set by the imagination, questions concerning what lies beyond these limits never demonstrably cease. The question, “what precedes or follows the imagined limits of past and future?” never contradicts our understanding of time, which is thus shown to be more culturally and historically determined than otherwise admitted.

Finally, rather than to imagine a past and future extended infinitely on a plane of sequential moments, or to imagine a time in which nothing happens or will happen, Nietzsche envisions connecting what lies beyond the imagination’s two temporal horizons, so that time is represented in the image of a circle, through which a colossal, but definitive number of possibilities are expressed. Time is infinite with this model, but filled by a finite number of material possibilities, recurring eternally in the never-ending play of the great cosmic game of chance.

What intuition led Nietzsche to interpret the cosmos as having no inherent meaning, as if it were playing itself out and repeating itself in eternally recurring cycles, in the endless creation and destruction of force-points without purpose? How does this curious temporal model relate to the living of life?  In his philosophical autobiography, Ecce Homo, Nietzsche grounds eternal recurrence in his own experiences by relating an anecdote regarding, supposedly, its first appearance to him in thought. One day, Nietzsche writes, while hiking around Lake Silvaplana near Sils Maria, he came upon a giant boulder, took out a piece of paper and scribbled, “6000 Fuss jenseits von Mensch und Zeit.” From here, Nietzsche goes on to articulate “the eternal recurrence of the same,” which he then characterizes as “a doctrine” or “a teaching” of the “highest form of affirmation that can possibly be attained.”

It is important to note that at the time of this discovery, Nietzsche was bringing his work on The Gay Science to a close and beginning to sketch out a plan for Zarathustra. The conceptualization of eternal recurrence emerges at the threshold of Nietzsche’s most acute positivistic inquiry and his most poetic creation. The transition between the two texts is made explicit when Nietzsche repeats the final aphorism of The Gay Science’s Book IV in the opening scene of Zarathustra’s prelude. The repetition of this scene will prove to be no coincidence, given the importance Nietzsche places upon the theme of recurrence in Zarathustra’s climactic chapters. Moreover, in the penultimate aphorism of The Gay Science, as a sort of introduction to that text’s Zarathustra scene (which itself would seem quite odd apart from the later work), Nietzsche first lays out Zarathustra’s central teaching, the idea of eternal recurrence.

The greatest weight.—What, if some day or night a demon were to steal after you into your loneliest loneliness and say to you: “This life as you now live it and have lived it, you will have to live once more and innumerable times more; and there will be nothing new in it, but every pain and every joy and every thought and sigh and everything unutterably small or great in your life will have to return to you, all in the same succession and sequence—even this spider and this moonlight between the trees, and even this moment and I myself. The eternal hourglass of existence is turned upside down again and again, and you with it, speck of dust!” (GS 341).

“What if,” wonders Nietzsche, the thought took hold of us? Here, the conceptualization of eternal recurrence, thus, coincides with questions regarding its impact: “how well disposed would you have to become to yourself and to life to crave nothing more fervently than this ultimate eternal confirmation and seal?”

How would the logic of this new temporal model alter our experiences of factual life? Would such a thought diminish the willfulness of those who grasp it? Would it diminish our willingness to make normative decisions? Would willing cease under the pessimistic suspicion that the course for everything has already been determined, that all intentions are “in vain”? What would we lose by accepting the doctrine of this teaching? What would we gain? It seems strange that Nietzsche would place so much dramatic emphasis on this temporal form of determinism. If all of our worldly strivings and cravings were revealed, in the logic of eternal recurrence, to be no more than illusions, if every contingent fact of creation and destruction were understood to have merely repeated itself without end, if everything that happens, as it happens, both re-inscribes and anticipates its own eternal recurrence, what would be the affect on our dispositions, on our capacities to strive and create? Would we be crushed by this eternal comedy? Or, could we somehow find it liberating?

Even though Nietzsche has envisioned a temporal model of existence seemingly depriving us of the freedom to act in unique ways, we should not fail to catch sight of the qualitative differences the doctrine nevertheless leaves open for the living. The logic of eternity determines every contingent fact in each cycle of recurrence. That is, each recurrence is quantitatively the same. The quality of that recurrence, however, seems to remain an open question. What if the thought took hold of us? If we indeed understood ourselves to be bound by fate and thus having no freedom from the eternal logic of things, could we yet summon love for that fate, to embrace a kind of freedom for becoming that person we are? This is the strange confluence of possibility and necessity that Nietzsche announces in the beginning of Gay Science’s Book IV, with the concept of Amor fati: “I want to learn more and more to see as beautiful what is necessary in things; then I shall be one of those who make things beautiful. Amor fati: let that be my love henceforth!”

Responses to this “doctrine” have been varied. Even some of the most enthusiastic Nietzsche commentators have, like Kaufmann, deemed it unworthy of serious reflection. Nietzsche, however, appears to stress its significance in Twilight of the Idols and Ecce Homo by emphasizing Zarathustra’s importance in the “history of humanity” and by dramatically staging in Thus Spoke Zarathustra the idea of eternal recurrence as the fundamental teaching of the main character. The presentation of this idea, however, leaves room for much doubt concerning the literal meaning of these claims, as does the paucity of direct references to the doctrine in other works intended for publication. In Nietzsche’s Nachlass, we discover attempts to work out rational proofs supporting the theory, but they seem to present no serious challenge to a linear conception of time. Among commentators taking the doctrine seriously, Löwith takes it as a supplement to Nietzsche’s historical nihilism, as a way of placing emphasis on the problem of meaning in history after the shadows of God have been dissolved. For Löwith’s Nietzsche, nihilism is more than an historical moment giving rise to a crisis of confidence or faith. Rather, nihilism is the essence of Nietzsche’s thought, and it poses the sorts of problems that lead Nietzsche into formulating eternal return as a way of restoring meaning in history. For Löwith, then, eternal return is inextricably linked to historical nihilism and offers both cosmological and anthropological grounds for accepting imperatives of self-overcoming. Yet, this grand attempt fails to restore meaning after the death of God, according to Löwith, because of eternal return’s logical contradictions.

8. Reception of Nietzsche’s Thought

The reception of Nietzsche’s work, on all levels of engagement, has been complicated by historical contingencies that are related only by accident to the thought itself. The first of these complications pertains to the editorial control gained by Elizabeth in the aftermath of her brother’s mental and physical collapse. Elisabeth’s overall impact on her brother’s reputation is generally thought to be very problematic. Her husband, Bernhard Förster, whom Friedrich detested, was a leader of the late nineteenth-century German anti-Semitic political movement, which Friedrich often ridiculed and unambiguously condemned, both in his published works and in private correspondences. On this issue, Yovel demonstrates persuasively, with a contextual analysis of letters, materials from the Nachlass, and published works, that Nietzsche developed an attitude of “anti-anti-Semitism” after overcoming the culture of prejudice that formed him in his youth (Yovel, 1998). In the mid-1880s, Förster and wife led a small group of colonists to Paraguay in hopes of establishing an idyllic, racially pure, German settlement. The colony foundered, Bernhard committed suicide, and Elisabeth returned home, just in time to find her brother’s health failing and his literary career ready to soar.

Upon her return, Elisabeth devised a way to keep alive the memory of both husband and brother, legally changing her last name to “Förster-Nietzsche,” a gesture indicative of designs to associate the philosopher with a political ideology he loathed. The stain of Elisabeth’s editorial imprint can be seen on the many ill-informed and haphazard interpretations of Nietzsche produced in the early part of the twentieth century, the unfortunate traces of which remain in some readings today. During the 1930s, in the midst of intense activity by National Socialist academic propagandists such as Alfred Bäumler, even typically insightful thinkers such as Emmanuel Levinas confused the public image of Nietzsche for the philosopher’s stated beliefs. Counter-efforts in the 1930s to refute such propaganda, and the popular misconceptions it was fomenting at the time, can be found both inside and outside Germany, in seminars, for example, led by Karl Jaspers and Karl Löwith, and in Georges Bataille’s essay “Nietzsche and the Fascists.” Of course, the ad hominem argument that “Nietzsche must be a Fascist philosopher because the Fascists venerated him as one of their own,” may be ignored. (No one should find Kant’s moral philosophy reprehensible, by comparison, simply on the grounds that Eichmann attempted to exploit it in a Jerusalem court). Apart from the fallacy, here, even the premise itself regarding Nietzsche and the Fascists is not entirely above reproach, since some Fascists were skeptical of the commensurability of Nietzsche’s thought with their political aims. The stronger claim that Nietzsche’s thought leads to National Socialism is even more problematic. Nevertheless, intellectual histories pursuing the question of how Nietzsche has been placed into the service of all sorts of political interests are an important part of Nietzsche scholarship.

Since the middle part of the last century, Nietzsche scholars have come to grips with the role played by Elisabeth and her associates in obscuring Nietzsche’s anti-Nationalistic, anti-Socialist, anti-German views, his pan-European advocacy of race mixing, as well as his hatred for anti-Semitism and its place in the late-nineteenth-century politics of exploitation. The work Elisabeth performed as her brother’s publicist, however, undoubtedly fulfilled all of her own fantasies: in the early 1930’s, decades after Friedrich’s death, the Nietzsche-Archiv was visited, ceremoniously, by Adolf Hitler, who was greeted and entertained by Elisabeth (in perhaps the most symbolic gesture of her association with the Nietzsche image) with a public reading of the work of her late husband, Bernhard, the anti-Semite. Hitler later attended Elisabeth’s funeral as Chancellor of Germany.

In a matter related to Elizabeth’s impact on the reception of her brother’s thought, the relevance of Nietzsche’s biography to his philosophical work has long been a point of contention among Nietzsche commentators. While an exhaustive survey of the way this key issue has been addressed in the scholarship would be difficult in this context, a few influential readings may be briefly mentioned. Among notable German readers, Heidegger and Fink dismiss the idea that Nietzsche’s thought can be elucidated with the details of his life, while Jaspers affirms the “exceptional” nature of Nietzsche’s life and identifies the exception as a key aspect of his philosophy. French readers such as Bataille, Deleuze, Klossowski, Foucault, and Derrida assert the relevance of various biographical details to specific movements within Nietzsche’s writings. In the United States, the influential reading of Walter Kaufman follows Heidegger, for the most part, in denying relevance, while his student, Alexander Nehamas, tends the other way, linking Nietzsche’s various literary styles to his “perspectivism” and ultimately to living, per se, as an self-interpretive gesture. However difficult it might be to see the philosophical relevance of various biographical curiosities, such as Nietzsche’s psychological development as a child without a living father, his fascination and then fallout with Wagner, his professional ostracism, his thwarted love life, the excruciating physical ailments that tormented him, and so on, it would also seem capricious and otherwise inconsistent with Nietzsche’s work to radically severe his thought from these and other biographical details, and persuasive interpretations have argued that such experiences, and Nietzsche’s well-considered views of them, are inseparable from the multiple trajectories of his intellectual work.

Attempts to isolate Nietzsche’s philosophy from the twists and turns of a frequently problematic life may be explained, in part, as a reaction to several early, and rather detrimental, popular-psychological studies attempting to explain the work in a reductive and decidedly un-philosophical manner. Such was the reading proffered, for example, by Lou Salomè, a woman with whom Nietzsche briefly had an unconventional and famously complex romantic relationship, and who later befriended Sigmund Freud among other leaders of European culture at the fin-de-siècle. Salomè’s Friedrich Nietzsche in His Works (1894) helped cast the image of Nietzsche as a lonely, miserable, self-immolating, recluse whose “external intellectual work…and inner life coalesce completely.” In some commentaries, this image prevails yet today, but its accuracy is also a matter of debate. Nietzsche had many casual associates and a few close friends while in school and as a professor in Basel. Even during the period of his most intense intellectual activity, after withdrawing from the professional world of the academy and, like Marx and others before him in the nineteenth century, taking up the wandering life of a “good European,” the many written correspondences between Nietzsche and life-long friends, along with what is known about the minor details of his daily habits, his days spent in the company of fellow lodgers and travelers, taking meals regularly (in spite of a very closely regulated diet), and similar anecdotes, all put forward a different image. No doubt the affair with Salomè and their mutual friend, the philosopher Paul Rée, left Nietzsche embittered towards the two of them, and it seems likely that this bitterness clouded Salomè’s interpretation of Nietzsche and his works. Elisabeth, who had always loathed Salomè for her immoderation and perceived influence over Friedrich, attempted to correct her rival’s account by writing her own biography of Friedrich, which was effusive in its praise but did little to advance the understanding of Nietzsche’s thought. Perhaps these kinds of problems, then, provide the best argument for resisting the lure to reduce interpretations of Nietzsche’s thought to gossipy biographical anecdotes and clumsy, amateurish speculation, even if the other extreme has also been excessive at times.

Another key issue in the reception of Nietzsche’s work involves determining its relationship to the thoughts of other philosophers and, indeed, to the philosophical tradition itself. On both levels of this complex issue, the work of Martin Heidegger looms paramount. Heidegger began working closely with Nietzsche’s thought in the 1930s, a time rife with political opportunism in Germany, even among scholars and intellectuals. In the midst of a struggle over the official Nazi interpretation of Nietzsche, Heidegger’s views began to coalesce, and after a series of lectures on Nietzsche’s thought in the late 1930’s and 1940, Heidegger produces in 1943 the seminal essay, “Nietzsche’s Word: “God is Dead””.  Nietzsche, for Heidegger, brought “the consummation of metaphysics” in the age of subject-centered reasoning, industrialization, technological power, and the “enframing” (Ge-stell) of humans and all other beings as a “standing reserve.” Combining Nietzsche’s self-described “inversion of Platonism” with the emphasis Nietzsche had undoubtedly placed upon the value-positing act and its relatedness to subjective or inter-subjective human perspectives, Heidegger dubbed Nietzsche “the last metaphysician” and tied him to the logic of a historical narrative highlighted by the appearances of Plato, Aristotle, Roman Antiquity, Christendom, Luther, Descartes, Leibniz, Schopenhauer, and others. The “one thought” common to each of these movements and thinkers, according to Heidegger, and the path Nietzsche thus thinks through to its “consummation,” is the “metaphysical” determination of being (Sein) as no more than something static and constantly present. Although Nietzsche appears to reject the concept of being as an “empty fiction” (claiming, in Twilight of the Idols, to concur with Heraclitus in this regard), Heidegger nevertheless reads in Nietzsche’s Platonic inversion the most insidious form of the metaphysics of presence, in which the destruction and re-establishment of value is taken to be the only possible occasion for philosophical labor whereby the very question of being is completely obliterated. Within this diminution of thought, the Nietzschean “Superman” emerges supremely powerful and triumphant, taking dominion over the earth and all of its beings, measured only by the mundane search for advantages in the ubiquitous struggle for preservation and enhancement.

As is typically the case with Heidegger’s interpretations of the history of philosophy, many aspects of this reading are truly remarkable—Heidegger’s scholarship, for example, his feel for what is important to Nietzsche, and his elaboration of Nietzsche’s work in a way that seems compatible with a narrative of the concealing and revealing destiny of being. However, the plausibility of this reading has come into question almost from the moment the full extent of it was made known in the 1950s and 60s. In Germany, for example, Eugen Fink concludes his 1960 study of Nietzsche by casting doubt upon Heidegger’s claim that Nietzsche’s thought can be reduced to a metaphysics:

Heidegger’s Nietzsche interpretation is essentially based upon  Heidegger’s summary and insight into the history of being and in particular on his interpretation of the metaphysics of modernity. Nevertheless, the question remains open whether Nietzsche does not already leave the metaphysical dimensions of any problems essentially and intentionally behind in his conception of the cosmos. There is a non-metaphysical originality in his cosmological philosophy of “play.” Even the early writings indicate the mysterious dimension of play….

Fink’s reluctance to take a stronger position against the reading of his renowned teacher seems rather coy, given that Fink’s study, throughout, has stressed the meaning and importance of “cosmological play” in Nietzsche’s work. Other commentators have much more explicitly challenged Heidegger’s grand narrative and specifically its place for Nietzsche in the Western tradition, concurring with Fink that Nietzsche’s conceptualization of play frees his thought from the tradition of metaphysics, or that Nietzsche, purposively or not, offered conflicting views of himself, eluding the kind of summary treatment presented by Heidegger and much less-gifted readers (who consider Nietzsche to be no more than a late-Romantic, a social-Darwinist, or the like). In this sort of commentary, Nietzsche’s work itself is at play in deconstructing the all-too-rigid kinds of explanations.

While such a reading has proven to be popular, partly because it seems to make room for various points of entry into Nietzsche’s thought, it has understandably stirred a backlash of sorts among less charitable commentators who find pragmatic or neo-Kantian strains in Nietzsche’s critique of metaphysics and who wish to separate Nietzsche’s level-headed philosophy from his poorly-developed musings. Notable works by Schacht, Clark, Conway, and Leiter fall into this category. In a loosely related movement, many commentators bring Nietzsche into dialogue with the tradition by concentrating on aspects of his work relevant to particular philosophical issues, such as the problem of truth, the development of a natural history of morals, a philosophical consideration of moral psychology, problems concerning subjectivity and logo-centrism, theories of language, and many others. Finally, much work continues to be done on Nietzsche in the history of ideas, regarding, for example, Nietzsche’s philology, his intellectual encounters with nineteenth-century science; the neo-Kantians; the pre-Socratics (or “pre-Platonics,” as he called them); the work of his friend, Paul Rée; their shared affinity for the wit and style of La Rochefoucauld; historical affinities and influences such as those pertaining to Hölderlin, Goethe, Emerson, and Lange, detailed studies of what Nietzsche was reading and when he was reading it, and a host of other themes. Works by Habermas, Porter, Gillespie, Brobjer, Ansell-Pearson, Conway, and Strong are notable for historicizing Nietzsche in a variety of contexts.

The Anglo-American reception of Nietzsche is typically suspicious of Heidegger’s influence and strongly disapproves of gestures linking the “New Nietzsche” found in late twentieth-century discussions of postmodernism and literary criticism to a supposed end of philosophy, although some American scholars will admit, with Gillespie, that “the core of this postmodern reading cannot simply be dismissed,” despite this reading’s excesses (1995, 177). Due to these suspicions, moreover, common Nietzschean themes such as historical nihilism, Dionysianism, tragedy, and play, as well as cosmological readings of will to power, and eternal recurrence are downplayed in Anglo-American treatments, in favor of bringing out more traditional sorts of philosophical problems such as truth and knowledge, values and morality, and human consciousness. Nietzsche reception in the United States has been determined by a unique set of circumstances, as portrayed by Schacht (1995) and others. A very early stage of that reception is stained by the Nazi-misappropriation of Nietzsche, which popular American audiences were prepared to accept uncritically due on the one hand to their initial impression of Nietzsche as an enemy of Christianity who ultimately went insane and on the other hand to their lack of familiarity with Nietzsche’s work. The next stage of Nietzsche reception in the U.S. benefited greatly from Walter Kaufmann’s landmark treatment in the 1950’s. Kaufmann’s Nietzsche was certainly no fascist. Rather, he was a secular humanist and a forerunner of the existentialist movement enjoying a measure of popularity (and acceptability) on college campuses in the United States during the 1950’s and 1960’s. Whereas European commentators such as Jaspers, Löwith, Bataille, and even Heidegger had been busy in the 1930’s “marshalling” Nietzsche (as Jaspers described it) against the National Socialists, in the U.S. it was left to Kaufmann and others in the 1950’s to successfully refute the image of Nietzsche as a Nazi-prototype. So successful was Kaufmann in this regard, that Anglo-American readers had difficulty seeing Nietzsche in any other light, and philosophers who found existentialism shallow regarded Nietzsche with the same disdain. This image of Nietzsche was corrected, somewhat, by Danto’s Nietzsche as Philosopher, which attempted to cast Nietzsche as a forerunner to analytic philosophy, although doubts about Nietzsche’s suitability for this role surely remain even today. To the extent that Danto succeeded in the 1970’s in reshaping philosophical discussions regarding Nietzsche, a new difficulty emerged, related generally to a tension in the world of Anglo-American philosophy between Analytic and Continental approaches to the discipline. In such a light, Schacht sees his work on Nietzsche as an attempt to bridge this institutional divide, as do other Anglo-American readers. The work of Rorty may certainly be characterized in this manner. Despite these attempts, tensions remain between Anglo-American readers who cultivate a neo-pragmatic version of Nietzsche and those who, by comparison, seem too comfortable accepting uncritically the problematic aspects of the Continental interpretation.

In most cases, interpretations of Nietzsche’s thought, and what is taken to be most significant about it, when not directed solely by external considerations, will be determined by the texts in Nietzsche’s corpus given priority and by a decision regarding Nietzsche’s overall coherence, as concerns any given issue, throughout the trajectory of his intellectual development.

9. References and Further Reading

a. Nietzsche’s Collected Works in German

  • Samtliche Werke: Kritische Studienausgabe, ed. Giorgio Colli and Mazzino Montinari, 15 vols (Berlin: de Gruyter, 1980).
    • This “critical student edition” of collected works, commonly referenced as the KSA, contains Nietzsche’s major writings and most of the well-known essays and aphorisms found in his journals. Specialists and readers seeking Nietzsche’s letters, his lectures at Basel, and other writings from his vast Nachlass, will need to supplement the KSA with two additional sources.
  • Kritische Gesamtausgabe: Briefwechsel, ed. Giorgio Colli and Mazzino Montinari, 24 vols. (Berlin: de Gruyter, 1975-84).
    • This edition offers a comprehensive collection of Nietzsche’s correspondences.
  • Kritische Gesamtausgabe: Werke, ed. Giorgio Colli and Mazzino Montinari, (Berlin: de Gruyter, 1967-).
    • The project of publishing a “complete edition” of Nietzsche’s writings was started in 1967 by Colli and Montinari and has since enlisted the services of a number of other editors. At the present time, the project remains unfinished. The most important contribution of the KGW, as this edition is commonly referenced, is perhaps its publication of Nietzsche’s lectures from the University of Basel on topics such as pre-Platonic philosophy, the Platonic dialogues, and ancient rhetoric.

b. Nietzsche’s Major Works Available in English

Most of Nietzsche’s major works were published during his lifetime and are now available to English readers in competing translations. The following list is by no means exhaustive.

  • The Birth of Tragedy (Die Geburt der Tragödie,1872); published in English with The Case of Wagner (Der Fall Wagner, 1888), trans. Walter Kaufmann, (New York: Vintage, 1966).
    • These two texts are available separately in other editions
  • Untimely Meditations (Unzeitgemässe Betrachtungen, 1873-1876), trans. R.J. Hollingdale (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1983).
    • The four essays of this work are available separately in other editions
  • Human, All Too Human (Menschliches, Allzumenschliches [vol. 1], 1878 and [vol. 2], 1879-1880), trans. R. J. Hollingdale (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1986).
    • Volume one of this work and the two distinct parts of volume two, “Assorted Maxims and Aphorisms” and “The Wanderer and His Shadow,” are available separately in other editions.
  • Daybreak (Morgenröte, 1881), trans. R, J. Hollingdale (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996).
    • The later editions of this translation contain a helpful index.
  • The Gay Science (Die fröliche Wissenschaft, 1882; with important supplements to the second edition, 1887), trans. Walter Kaufman (New York: Vintage, 1974).
  • Thus Spoke Zarathustra (Also Sprach Zarathustra, bks I-II, 1883; bk III, 1884; bk IV [printed and distributed privately], 1885), trans. R. J. Hollingdale, (New York: Penguin, 1973).
  • Beyond Good and Evil (Jenseits von Gut und Böse, 1886), trans. Walter Kaufman (New York: Vintage, 1966).
  • On the Genealogy of Morality (Zur Genealogie der Moral, 1887), edited with important supplements from the Nachlass and other works by Keith Ansell-Pearson; trans. Carol Diethe (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1995).
  • The Case of Wagner (Der Fall Wagner, 1888); published in English with The Birth of Tragedy (Die Geburt der Tragödie,1872), trans. Walter Kaufmann, (New York: Vintage, 1966)
  • Ecce Homo (Ecce Homo, 1888, first published 1908), trans. R. J. Hollingdale (New York: Penguin, 1992).
  • Nietzsche contra Wagner (Nietzsche contra Wagner, 1888, first published 1895), trans. Walter Kaufmann, in The Portable Nietzsche, ed. Walter Kaufmann (New York: Viking, 1954).
  • Twilight of the Idols (Götzen-Dämmerung, 1889); published in English with The Anti-Christ (Der Antichrist, 1888), trans. R. J. Hollingdale (New York: Penguin, 1968).

c. Important Works Available in English from Nietzsche’s Nachlass

Nietzsche’s Nachlass contains several developed essays and an overwhelming number of fragments, sketches of outlines, and aphorisms, some in thematically related successions. A number of these writings are available to English readers, and a few are accessible in a variety of editions, either as supplements to the major works or as part of assorted critical editions. The following list offers a sample of these writings.

  • “Homer on Competition” (“Homers Wettkampf,” 1872) and “The Greek State” (Der griechische Staat, 1872), included in On the Genealogy of Morality (Zur Genealogie der Moral, 1887), ed. Keith Ansell-Pearson; trans. Carol Diethe (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1995).
  • “On Truth and Lies in a Nonmoral Sense” (“Über Wahrheit und Lüge im aussermoralischen Sinne,” 1873), collected in various editions, including Philosophy and Truth: Selections from Nietzsche’s Notebooks of the early 1870’s, ed. and trans. Daniel Breazeale (New Jersey: Humanities Press, 1979) and Friedrich Nietzsche on Rhetoric and Language, ed. and trans. Sander L. Gilman, Carole Blair, and David J. Parent (New York: Oxford University Press, 1989).
  • Philosophy in the Tragic Age of the Greeks (Die Philosophie im tragischen Zeitalter der Griechen, 1873), trans. Marianne Cowan (Washington, D. C.: Gateway Editions, 1962).
  • The Pre-Platonic Philosophers (Die vorplatonischen Philosophen, lectures during various semesters at Basel from 1869 to 1876; ed. by Fritz Bornmann and Mario Carpitella for the KGW, vol. II, part 4), ed. and trans. with an interpretive essay and appendix by Greg Whitlock (Urbana, IL: University of Illinois Press, 2001).
  • Unpublished Writings from the Period of Unfashionable Observations (vol. 11 of The Completed Works of Friedrich Nietzsche), based on the KGW, adapted by Ernst Behler; ed. Bernd Magnus; trans. Richard T. Gray (Stanford, CA: Stanford University Press, 1999).
  • The Will to Power (Der Wille zur Macht, writings from the Nachlass ed. and arranged by Elizabeth Förster-Nietzsche and Peter Gast and published in various forms after Nietzsche’s death), trans. Walter Kaufmann and R. J. Hollingdale (New York: Vintage, 1967).
  • Writings from the Late Notebooks (writings from the Nachlass), ed. Rüdigger Bittner; trans. Kate Sturge (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2003).

d. Biographies

A firsthand and secondhand biographical narrative may be followed in the collected letters of Nietzsche and his associates:

  • Selected Letters of Friedrich Nietzsche, ed. Christopher Middleton (Indianapolis: Hackett, 1996)
  • Conversations with Nietzsche: A Life in the Words of His Contemporaries, ed. Sander L. Gilman, trans. David J. Parent (New York: Oxford University Press, 1987).

The following list includes a few of the most well known biographies in English.

  • Diethe, Carol. Nietzsche’s Sister and the Will to Power: A Biography of Elisabeth Förster-Nietzsche (Urbana: University of Illinois Press, 2003).
  • Hayman, Ronald. Nietzsche: A Critical Life (New York: Oxford University Press, 1980).
  • Hollingdale, R. J. Nietzsche, the Man and His Philosophy (Baton Rouge: Louisiana State University Press, 1965).
  • Pletsch, Carl. Young Nietzsche: Becoming a Genius (New York: The Free Press, 1991).
  • Safranski, Rüdiger. Nietzsche: Biographie Seines Denkens (Muenchen: Carl Hanser, 2000).
  • Nietzsche: A Philosophical Biography, trans. Shelley Frisch (New York: Norton, 2002).
  • Salomé, Lou. Nietzsche, ed. and trans. Siegfried Mandel (Redding Ridge, CT: Black Swan, 1988).

e. Commentaries and Scholarly Researches

Hollingdale once wrote that Nietzsche anticipated what would soon become “part of the consciousness of every thinking person” living in the twentieth century and, no doubt, beyond. During the last forty years, Nietzsche scholarship has generated a considerable amount of commentary and research, and some of the most important of these texts were produced by the twentieth century’s most significant thinkers. Even so, the work of elucidating Nietzsche’s thought seems unfinished. The following list is by no means comprehensive, nor does it purport to represent all of the major themes prevalent in Nietzsche scholarship today. It is designed for the reader seeking to learn more about the intellectual history of Nietzsche reception in the twentieth century.

  • Allison, David B. ed.,  The New Nietzsche: Contemporary Styles of Interpretation, (Cambridge, Mass.: MIT Press, 1985).
  • Allison, David B. Reading the New Nietzsche (Lanham, MD: Rowman and Littlefield, 2001).
  • Ansell-Pearson, Keith. An Introduction to Nietzsche as Political Thinker (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1994).
  • Aschheim, Steven E. The Nietzsche Legacy in Germany: 1890-1990 (Berkeley: University of California Press, 1994).
  • Bambach, Charles R. Heidegger’s Roots: Nietzsche, National Socialism, and the Greeks (Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 2003).
    • This text delivers a scholarly, critical account of Heidegger’s intellectual encounter with Nietzsche against the politically charged backdrop of Germany in the 1930s.
  • Bataille, Georges. Sur Nietzsche (Paris, Gallimard, 1945), available in English under the title, On Nietzsche, trans. Bruce Boon (New York: Paragon House, 1992).
  • Bataille, Georges. “Nietzsche and the Fascists,” available in Visions of Excess: Selected Writings, 1927-1939 (which includes other essays devoted to Nietzsche), ed. Allan Stoekl, trans. Stoekl, et. al (Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1985).
  • Brobjer, Thomas. Nietzsche’s Philosophical Context: An Intellectual Biography (Urbana: University of Illinois Press, 2008).
    • Brobjer delivers invaluable resource for collating Nietzsche’s writings with the texts that he was himself reading.
  • Clark, Maudemarie. Nietzsche on Truth and Philosophy (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1990).
    • This study is representative of the trend in American scholarship emphasizing those parts of Nietzsche’s thought apparently commensurate with pragmatic and neo-Kantian concerns. It is, perhaps, the best point of entry for readers hoping to gain such insight. For Clark, many of Nietzsche’s remarks on truth are simply confused, although he is redeemed as a philosopher by conclusions drawn in 1887 and thereafter.
  • Conway, Daniel W. Nietzsche's Dangerous Game: Philosophy in the Twilight of the Idols (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2002).
  • Conway, Daniel W. Nietzsche and the Political (London: Routledge, 1997).
  • Danto, Authur C. Nietzsche as Philosopher (New York: Columbia University Press, 1965).
    • According to Danto, a surprisingly rigorous analytic system of thought is embedded in Nietzsche’s writings, which for Danto are rather poorly executed from a philosophical perspective. In this reading, Nietzsche’s architectonic shortcomings are redeemed, even unconsciously, by the consistency of his polemics.
  • Deleuze, Gilles. Nietzsche et la philosophie, (Paris: Presses Universitaires de France, 1962), available in English under the title, Nietzsche and Philosophy, trans. Hugh Thomlinson (New York: Columbia University Press, 1983).
    • Deleuze’s seminal work delivers the classic statement on Nietzsche as a thinker of processes and relations of active and reactive forces. For Deleuze, Nietzsche is a post-Kantian thinker of historical consciousness and a genealogist refuting the dialectic rationalism of Hegel
  • Derrida, Jacques. Spurs: Nietzsche’s Styles (Èperons: Les Styles de Nietzsche), published with French and English facing pages, trans. Barbara Harlow (Chicago: The University of Chicago Press, 1979).
  • Derrida, Jacques . “Interpreting Signatures (Nietzsche/Heidegger): Two Questions,” trans. Diane P. Michelfelder and Richard E. Palmer in Dialogue and Deconstruction: The Gadamer-Derrida Encounter (Albany: State University of New York Press, 1989).
  • Fink, Eugen. Nietzsches Philosophie (Stuttgart: Kohlhammer, 1960); available in English under the title, Nietzsche’s Philosophy, trans. Goetz Richter (London: Continuum, 2003).
  • Foucault, Michel. “Nietzsche, la généalogie, l’historiè,” in Hommage à Jean Hyppolite (Paris: Presses Universitaires de France, 1971), available in English under the title, “Nietzsche, Genealogy, History,” trans. Donald F. Bouchard and Sherry Simon in The Foucault Reader, ed. Paul Rabinow (New York: Pantheon Books, 1984), 76-100.
    • According to Foucault, Nietzsche’s genealogies eschew the search for origins and teleology with the result of uncovering simply the “play of dominations” in history.
  • Gillespie, Michael Allen. Nihilism Before Nietzsche (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1995).
  • Gillespie, Michael Allen and Strong, Tracy B. ed. Nietzsche’s New Seas (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1988).
  • Golomb, Jacob and Robert S. Wistrich ed. Nietzsche, Godfather of Fascism? On the Uses and Abuse of a Philosophy (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 2002).
  • Habermas, Jürgen. Der philosophische Diskurs der Moderne (Frankfurt: Suhrkamp, 1985), available in English under the title, The Philosophical Discourse of Modernity, trans. Frederick Lawrence (Cambridge, MA: MIT Press, 1987).
    • These lectures offer a historical reading of Nietzsche’s decisive role in interrupting “the discourse of Modernity” and abandoning its emancipatory content. Habermas detects two dominant strains of post-Nietzschean philosophical rhetoric: a Dionysian messianism (transmitted through Heidegger and Derrida) which longs for the absent god and a fetishization of power, heterogeneity, and subversion (found in Bataille and Foucault).
  • Heidegger, Martin. “Nietzsches Wort‘Gott is tot,’” in Holzwege (Frankfurt: Vittorio Klostermann, 1952 [written in 1943]). The essay is available to English readers as “Nietzsche’s Word: God is dead” in The Question Concerning Technology and other essays, trans. William Lovitt; co-edited J. Glenn Gray and Joan Stambaugh (New York: Harper, 1977).
    • This essay is Heidegger’s first published and most concise treatment of Nietzsche.
    • Heidegger’s preparation for this essay includes several lecture courses devoted entirely to Nietzsche’s philosophy, taught at the University of Freiburg from 1936 to 1940.
    • The published form of these lectures first appeared during 1961 in two volumes.
  • Heidegger, Martin. Nietzsche I-II (Pfulligen: Neske, 1961).
    • Beginning in 1979, Heidegger’s Nietzsche lectures at Freiberg became available to English readers in piecemeal fashion, along with other materials in a somewhat confusing manner, in a two edition, four-volume, set.
  • Heidegger, Martin . Nietzsche, vol. I-IV, trans. David Farrell Krell, (San Francisco: Harper, 1979ff).
    • The philosophy of Nietzsche plays a prominent role in several other works by Heidegger.
  • Heidegger, Martin.  “Platons Lehre von der Wahrheit,”(written in 1930, revised in 1940), published in Wegmarken (Frankfurt am Main: Klostermann, 1967); available in English under the title, “Plato’s Doctrine of Truth,” in Pathmarks, ed. William McNeill (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1998).
  • Heidegger, Martin. “Was Heisst Denken?” (Tübingen: Niemeyer, 1954); available in English under the title, “What is Called Thinking?,” trans. J. Glenn Gray and Fred Wieck (San Francisco: Harper, 1968).
  • Heidegger, Martin. “Wer ist Nietzsches Zarathustra?” in Vorträge und Aufsätze (Stuttgart: Neske, 1954); available in English under the title, “Who is Nietzsche’s Zarathustra?” in Nietzsche vol. II trans. David Farrell Krell, (San Francisco: Harper, 1979), 209-233.
  • Jaspers, Karl. Nietzsche. Einführung in das Verständnis seines Philosophierens (Berlin: de Gruyter, 1936); available in English under the title, Nietzsche: An Introduction to the Understanding of His Philosophical Activity, trans. Charles F. Wallraff and Frederick J. Schmitz (Baltimore: Johns Hopkins University Press, 1997)
  • Kaufmann, Walter. Nietzsche: Philosopher, Psychologist, Antichrist, 4th edition: (Princeton: PUP, 1974). Kaufmann’s study was a watershed text in the history of Nietzsche reception in the United States
  • Klossowski, Pierre. Nietzsche et le cercle vicieux (Paris: Mercure de France, 1969), available in English under the title, Nietzsche and the Vicious Circle, trans. Daniel W. Smith (Chicago and London: University of Chicago Press and Athlone Press, 1997)
  • Lambert, Laurence. Leo Strauss and Nietzsche (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1996)
  • Lambert, Laurence. Nietzsche’s Teaching: An Interpretation of ‘Thus Spoke Zarathustra,’ (New Haven: Yale University Press, 1986)
  • Leiter, Brian. Nietzsche on Morality (London: Routledge, 2002).
    • Leiter plays down the ineffable aspects of Nietzsche’s thought in order to elaborate formally and concisely Nietzsche’s writings on morality, especially from the Genealogy. This approach lends credit to the claim that Nietzsche was foremost a moral philosopher with pragmatic, even analytic consistency
  • Löwith, Karl. Nietzsche’s Philosophy of the Eternal Return of the Same, trans. J. Harvey Lomax (Berkley: University of California Press, 1997).
    • Löwith’s study was originally produced in the mid 1930’s, during a wave of interest that included treatments by Heidegger and Jaspers. Like these works, Löwith attempted to correct Alfred Bäumler’s political misappropriation. While National Socialist renditions glorify subjectivity and power in will to power and to the exclusion of eternal return and other ineffable concepts, Löwith places eternal return at the forefront of Nietzsche’s thought, arguing that such thought is thereby flawed with internal contradictions
  • MacIntyre, Ben. Forgotten Fatherland: The Search for Elisabeth Nietzsche (New York: Farrar, Strauss, Giroux 1992).
    • This study offers a somewhat informative, if rather sensationalistic, account of Elizabeth and Bernhard Förster’s sordid misadventure in Paraguay. This title should not be counted on, however, for any sort of understanding of Nietzsche’s philosophy
  • Michelfelder, Diane P. and Palmer, Richard E. eds. Dialogue and Deconstruction: The Gadamer-Derrida Encounter (Albany: SUNY Press, 1989).
    • This text chronicles an interesting confrontation on Nietzsche reception between two landmark philosophers of the late twentieth century. The encounter regards Heidegger’s reading of Nietzsche and what it implies for post-Heideggerian thought
  • Montinari, Mazzino. Reading Nietzsche trans. Greg Whitlock (Urbana: University of Illinois Press, 2003).
    • With Giorgio Colli, Montinari was coeditor of the KSA and the first volumes of the KGW. This translation of his collection of lectures and essays originally published in 1982 portrays Nietzsche being primarily interested in science, albeit taken off course for a time by Wagner and their shared interest in Schopenhauer. Montinari’s Nietzsche is best characterized as having a lifelong “passion for knowledge.” However, Montinari’s insights into previous editions of Nietzsche’s corpus, and the editorial politics behind these editions, may be the most valuable parts of this interesting work
  • Mueller-Lauter,Wolfgang. Nietzsche: His Philosophy of Contradictions and the Contradictions of His Philosophy, trans. David J. Parent (Urbana: University of Illinois Press, 1999)
  • Nehamas, Alexander. Nietzsche: Life as Literature, (Cambridge, Massachusetts: Harvard University Press, 1985).
  • Porter, James I.  Nietzsche and the Philology of the Future (Stanford: Stanford University Press, 2000).
    • Porter’s study places Nietzsche’s philology in historical context and shows how this training prepared hermeneutic gestures found in later Nietzsche’s philosophy of interpretation
  • Porter, James I. The Invention of Dionysus: An Essay on the Birth of Tragedy (Stanford: Stanford University Press, 2000)
  • Schacht, Richard. Nietzsche: The Great Philosophers (London: Routledge, 1983)
  • Schacht, Richard. Making Sense of Nietzsche: Reflections Timely and Untimely (Champagne/Urbana, IL: University of Illinois Press, 1995)
  • Schrift, Alan D. Nietzsche’s French Legacy: A Genealogy of Poststructuralism (New York: Routledge, 1995).
    • As the title promises, this text surveys aspects of the French reception of Nietzsche
  • Schutte, Ofelia. Beyond Nihilism: Nietzsche Without Masks (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1984)
  • Strauss, Leo. “Note on the Plan of Nietzsche’s Beyond Good and Evil” in Studies in Platonic Political Philosophy (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1983).
    • Strauss’ take on Nietzsche, here and elsewhere, has generated quite a bit of scholarship on its own
  • Strong, Tracy B. Friedrich Nietzsche and the Politics of Transfiguration: Expanded Edition, (Berkley: University of California Press, 1988).
    • Strong’s reading is somewhat esoteric, but it nevertheless brings out important political tensions seemingly implied in Nietzsche’s encounter with Socrates, Aeschylus, and other Greeks
  • Vattimo, Gianni. The End of Modernity trans. Jon R. Snyder (Baltimore: Johns Hopkins, 1988)
  • Vattimo, Gianni. Nihilism and Emancipation (New York: Columbia University Press, 2004).
    • With these titles and several others, Vattimo takes up Heidegger’s transmission of Nietzsche and works out the issue of “completed nihilism” with impressive results. Vattimo’s Nietzsche emerges as one of the best philosophical resources for grounding emancipatory discourse in the twentieth first century
  • Waite, Geoff. Nietzsche’s Corps/e, (Durham, NC: Duke University Press, 1996).
    • Waite offers a richly thematized, innovative Kulturkampf using Nietzsche-reception itself as a wedge for breaking open a variety of late-twentieth century issues
  • Yovel, Yirmiyahu. Dark Riddle: Hegel, Nietzsche, and the Jews (University Park, PA: Penn State University Press, 1998)
  • Zimmerman, Michael. Heidegger’s Confrontation with Modernity: Technology, Politics, Art (Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1990).
    • Zimmerman delivers a useful text for understanding this key conduit of Nietzsche reception.

f. Academic Journals in Nietzsche Studies

In addition to a typically large number full-length manuscripts on Nietzsche published every year, scholarly works in English may be found in general, academic periodicals focused on Continental philosophy, ethical theory, critical theory, the history of ideas and similar themes. In addition, some major journals are devoted entirely to Nietzsche and aligned topics. Related both to the issue of orthodoxy and to the backlash against multiplicity in Nietzsche interpretation, the value of having so many outlets available for Nietzsche commentators has even been questioned. The following journals are devoted specifically to Nietzsche studies.

  • Nietzsche-Studien (Berlin: de Gruyter).
  • The Journal of Nietzsche Studies (University Park, PA: The Pennsylvania State University Press).
  • New Nietzsche Studies: The Journal of the Nietzsche Society (New York: Nietzsche Society).

Author Information

Dale Wilkerson
University of North Texas, Denton
U. S. A.

Śāntideva (fl. 8th c.)

Śāntideva (literally “god of peace”) was the name given to an Indian Mahāyāna Buddhist philosopher-monk, known as the author of two texts, the Bodhicaryāvatāra and the Śikṣāsamuccaya. These works both express the ideal of the bodhisattva — the ideal person of Mahāyāna Buddhism. The term Mahāyāna, literally “Great Vehicle,” came into use to mean the idea of attempting to become a bodhisattva (and eventually a buddha) oneself, rather than merely following the teachings set out by Siddhārtha Gautama (considered the original Buddha). This was the earliest usage of the term mahāyāna in Sanskrit, although even by Śāntideva's time, understandings of what becoming a bodhisattva involved had undergone many changes; the Mahāyāna had come to be understood as a separate school rather than as a vocation (see Nattier 2003; Harrison 1987).

Both of Śāntideva's texts explore the bodhisattva ideal as an ethical one, in that they prescribe how a person should properly live, and provide reasons for living in that way. Śāntideva's close attention to ethics makes him relatively unusual among Indian philosophers, for whom metaphysics (or theoretical philosophy more generally) was more typically the primary concern. Śāntideva’s ethical thought is widely known, cited  and loved among Tibetan Buddhists, and is increasingly coming to the attention of Western thinkers. Śāntideva's metaphysics is of interest primarily because of its close connection to his ethics.

Table of Contents

  1. History and Works
    1. Writings
    2. Life
    3. Reception and Influence
  2. The Progress of the Bodhisattva
  3. Excellence in Means
  4. Good and Bad Karma
  5. The Perfections
    1. Giving
      1. Giving as Giving Up
      2. Upward Gifts: Expressing Esteem
      3. Downward Gifts: Attracting Others
    2. Good Conduct
    3. Patient Endurance
      1. Happiness from Enduring Suffering
      2. The Case Against Anger
    4. Heroic Strength
    5. Meditation
      1. Equalization of Self and Other
      2. Exchange of Self and Other
      3. Meditations Against the Three Poisons
    6. Metaphysical Insight
      1. Content
      2. Practical Implications
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Works
    2. Translations Cited
    3. General Studies of Śāntideva
    4. Specialized Studies
    5. Related Interest

1. History and Works

a. Writings

The name “Śāntideva” is associated above all with two extant texts: the Bodhicaryāvatāra (hereafter BCA) and the Śikṣāsamuccaya (hereafter ŚS). The Bodhicaryāvatāra (often rendered “Guide to the Bodhisattva’s Way of Life”), in its most widely known form, is a work of just over 900 verses. Tibetan legends suggest that the text was originally recited orally (see de Jong 1975), as do the text’s own literary features. Although it has been translated into Tibetan multiple times and is revered throughout Tibetan Buddhist tradition, it was originally composed and redacted in Sanskrit. Its Sanskrit is relatively close to Pānini’s official standards of grammar, with a Buddhist vocabulary.  Its ten chapters lead their reader through the path to becoming a bodhisattva — which is to say a future Buddha, and therefore a being on the way to perfection, according to Mahāyāna tradition.

The Śikṣāsamuccaya (“Training Anthology”) is a longer prose work in nineteen chapters. The ŚS is organized as a commentary on twenty-seven short mnemonic verses known as the Śikṣāsamuccaya Kārikā (hereafter ŚSK). It consists primarily of quotations (of varying length) from sūtras, authoritative texts considered to be the word of the Buddha — generally those sūtras associated with Mahāyāna tradition. Most scholars have taken the ŚS to be composed almost entirely of such quotations. However, Paul Harrison (2007) has recently claimed that a substantial portion of it is original to the redactor.

Like the BCA, the ŚS was originally composed in Sanskrit, as were the sūtras it quotes. However, while Śāntideva's own portions are in relatively standard Sanskrit, the quotations are mostly in the heavily vernacularized language usually known as Buddhist Hybrid Sanskrit. It is considerably less accessible to a novice reader than the BCA, and its organization can be bewildering. Richard Mahoney (2002) has recently provided a clear account of the text’s structure, which will be discussed later in this article.

Who were these texts written for? One can infer from the texts that they are intended for an audience of men whose sexual desires are directed toward women, as the auditor’s sexual cravings are always discussed in those terms. Therefore, the use of masculine forms to refer to the implied audience is unproblematic. This auditor also understands Sanskrit, and lives in or after the seventh century CE. His knowledge of Sanskrit implies, at the least, that he is well educated, and therefore well versed in the ideas of classical Sanskritic culture. And he is not necessarily on the bodhisattva path when he begins reading or hearing the texts, but is motivated to enter that path by studying them.

The texts’ implied audience includes monks, and may also include householders (nonmonks). While monks are a significant component of the text’s implied audience (Onishi 2003), and are in some respects the ideal audience, they are not necessarily the only such audience. The principles of conduct put forth in the BCA’s fifth chapter resemble those of vinaya monastic codes, and indeed some of them have been taken directly from the prātimokṣa monastic rule books (Crosby and Skilton 1995, 32), but few of them would be impossible or absurd for a householder to follow. In the ŚS, too, Śāntideva certainly considers monasticism better and more praiseworthy than the householder life, but part of his task is to convince householding readers to pursue the monastic life. He claims that “in every birth the great bodhisattva goes forth [as a monk] . . . from the household life” (ŚS 14). But this is a process renewed in every lifetime, beginning with the household life; and Śāntideva does refer on multiple occasions to householding bodhisattvas (for example at ŚS 120 and 267). This text, then, is addressed in part to householders.

b. Life

Tibetan hagiographic histories (Bu ston, Tāranātha, Ye shes dPal ‘byor and Sum pa mKhan po) provide the most detailed accounts of Śāntideva's life, although most contemporary historians doubt their veracity. In brief, they tell of a prince from Saurāstra (in contemporary Gujarat) who joined the great monastic university of Nālandā. His fellow monks, unaware of his wisdom, saw only a lazy man unworthy of their company. To prove his presumed lack of knowledge, they asked him to recite a Buddhist sūtra text. Śāntideva, undaunted, asked whether they would like to hear something old or something new. Asked for something new, he proceeded to recite the BCA. When he reached verse IX.34 — “When neither an entity nor a nonentity remain before thought, then thought, with no object, is pacified because it has no other destination” — he rose into the air and his body disappeared. The remainder of the text was recited by a disembodied voice. The written text of the ŚS, the voice told the audience, could be found in Śāntideva's room, along with a text called the Sūtrasamuccaya (Pezzali 1968, 4-20). There is some debate among scholars as to the nature of the latter work, but all agree that the title does not refer to any additional surviving work of Śāntideva's, and that the BCA and ŚS constitute his extant corpus (see Lele 2007, 17n8).

Beyond the hagiographies, most of what we know of Śāntideva comes from the ideas found in extant recensions of his texts. This article treats Śāntideva's works together, as the works of a single author, as Indian and Tibetan Buddhist tradition has always done; similarly, it refers to the ideas found in the canonical Sanskrit recensions of the texts, not to the Tibetan or to the BCA recension found at Dunhuang. Since the article’s approach is to examine the ideas of this author, Śāntideva, it spends relatively little time on the structure of each of his two texts as separate units. For an overview of the relevant textual issues and a defense of this article’s approach to the texts, see Lele 2007, 9-31. More specifically, for a discussion of the Dunhuang recension, see Saito 1993. For discussions of the structure of the BCA, see Crosby and Skilton 1995; Saito 1993. For discussions of the structure of the ŚS, see Clayton 2006; Griffiths 1999, 133-43; Hedinger 1984; Mahoney 2002; Mrozik 2007. On both, see Pezzali 1968.

It is difficult to learn much about the texts’ historical composer, or their redactor, beyond what is found in the texts themselves. As noted, Tibetan historians recount the life story of a Śāntideva identified as the texts’ author, but it is difficult to sort fact from legend with so little corroborating evidence. There seems little reason to doubt that someone by the name of Śāntideva wrote some portion of the two texts, or that he was a monk at Nālandā. (The Tibetan historians agree on this last point, and based on what we know of Indian Buddhist history it seems a likely place for historically significant Buddhist works to have been composed.) Paul Griffiths (1999, 114-24) uses the accounts of Chinese and Tibetan visitors to reconstruct a detailed account of what life and literary culture at Nālandā might have looked like.

Beyond these points, we can say relatively little beyond the approximate date of the texts’ composition. The Tibetan translator Ye shes sde, who rendered the BCA into Tibetan, worked under the king Khri lde srong brtsan (816-838 CE), so it must have been composed before that time (Bendall 1970, v). Since the Chinese pilgrim Yijing (or I-tsing) mentions all the major Indian Mahāyāna thinkers known in India but does not mention Śāntideva, it is likely that these texts were composed, or at least became famous, after Yijing left India in 685 CE (Pezzali 1968, 38). We may therefore assign Śāntideva an approximate date of  sometime in the eighth century.

c. Reception and Influence

As historical evidence on India is difficult to come by, it is relatively difficult to ascertain Śāntideva's influence in the later Indian Buddhist philosophical tradition. Nevertheless, a significant number of later Indian texts do refer to the BCA and ŚS (Bendall 1970, viii-x), so Śāntideva's work must have been relatively important there.

It is far easier to speak of Śāntideva's influence in Tibet. Tibetan Buddhists revere Śāntideva and his work, especially the BCA. All the major Tibetan texts on the stages of the bodhisattva path, such as those of Tsong kha pa and sGam po pa, quote it at length (Sweet 1977, 4-5); it is a key  source for the entire Tibetan literary genre of blo sbyong or lojong (“mental purification”) (Sweet 1996, 245). The present Dalai Lama cites it as the highest inspiration for his ideals and practices (Williams 1995, ix). Tibetan commentators have written many commentaries on the text over the years, several of which are now available in English translation (e.g. Gyatso 1986; Rinpoche 2002; Tobden 2005). While the ŚS was less influential overall, the tradition has not ignored it. In 1998 the present Dalai Lama gave public teachings on the ŚS, referring to it as a “key which can unlock all the teachings of the Buddha” (quoted in Clayton 2006, 2). Śāntideva's work has played a significant role in other cultures influenced by Tibetan Buddhism, such as Mongolia (see, for example, de Rachewiltz 1996; Kanaoka 1963). A less influential translation of the BCA was also made into Chinese (Bendall 1970, xxix-xxx).

The BCA has also been widely translated, studied, and admired in the West. (See Onishi 2003 for a thesis-length discussion of the text's Western reception.) Luís Gómez (1999, 262-3) even suggests that it is now the third most frequently translated text in all of Indian Buddhism, after the Dhammapāda and the Heart Sūtra. A recent introductory text (Cooper 1998) also treats the BCA as one of “the classic readings” in ethics, alongside such works as Plato’s Gorgias and Mill’s Utilitarianism.  The BCA is an appropriate choice for a reading in Buddhist ethics, for relatively few Buddhist texts make explicit ethical arguments. This situation even leads one scholar (Keown 2005, 50) to proclaim that Buddhism “does not have normative ethics,” though he does not appear to have taken Śāntideva's work into account in making this claim (see Lele 2007, 48-52).

2. The Progress of the Bodhisattva

The central concern of both of Śāntideva's texts is the bodhisattva, literally “awakening-being.” A bodhisattva is a being aiming to become a buddha (literally “awakened one”); the process of the final transformation into a buddha is called bodhi, “awakening,” sometimes referred to as “enlightenment.” The title Bodhicaryâvatāra, “introduction to conduct for awakening,” is usually taken to be short for Bodhisattvacaryâvatāra — “introduction to the conduct of a bodhisattva,” or “A Guide to the Bodhisattva Way of Life,” as one major translation (Wallace and Wallace 1997) has it. “Introduction to the conduct of a bodhisattva” is an appropriate description of the contents of the text, although “introduction to conduct for awakening” would be equally appropriate. Śāntideva also introduces the Śikṣāsamuccaya by claiming he will explain the sugatâtmajasamvārâvatāra, a similar phrase meaning “introduction to the requirements for the sons of the Sugatas” (ŚS 1). (Throughout Buddhist literature sugata, literally “gone well,” is a common term for buddhas, and Mahāyāna literature regularly refers to bodhisattvas as the buddhas’ sons.) The term “bodhisattva” occurs at least seven times in the nineteen chapters of the ŚS. This section examines the bodhisattva’s progress from being an ordinary person through to being a buddha, as this progress is discussed in Śāntideva's texts.

To describe those who are neither bodhisattvas nor buddhas, Śāntideva most frequently uses the term “ordinary person,” prithagjana. He refers at one point to “all buddhas, bodhisattvas, solitary buddhas, noble searchers and ordinary people” (ŚS 9) — suggesting that ordinary people are the residual category of all those who do not fall into the previous categories. It is standard in Mahāyāna texts to refer to three “vehicles” (yāna) or paths, with the vehicles of the searcher (śrāvaka) and solitary buddha (pratyekabuddha) being distinguished from the Great Vehicle (mahāyāna) of the bodhisattva. It is quite rare, however, for Śāntideva to refer to searchers and solitary buddhas, and even buddhas appear relatively infrequently, so in practice the most important distinction in his texts is between bodhisattvas and ordinary people.

Śāntideva's view of ordinary people is not flattering. The term “ordinary person” frequently occurs in his work alongside the term “fool” (bāla) — sometimes with the latter as a modifier (“foolish ordinary person,” bālaprithagjana, as at ŚS 61) and sometimes with the two terms used synonymously and interchangeably, as at ŚS 194. Ordinary people’s foolishness traps them in suffering; the way for them to escape from suffering is to enter the bodhisattva path and become a bodhisattva.

To become a bodhisattva, one must possess the awakening mind (bodhicitta). This mental transformation brings one out of the status of ordinary person and points one toward awakening. Śāntideva makes an important distinction between two kinds of the awakening mind: the mind resolved on awakening (bodhipraṇidhicitta) and the mind proceeding to awakening (bodhiprasthānacitta). The first, he tells us, can be reached quickly; it exists when the thought “I must become a buddha” arises as a vow (ŚS 8). He is not as explicit about the nature of the second, but in describing the first he notes that “the awakening mind is productive even without conduct” (ŚS 9), suggesting that conduct (caryā, bodhicaryā) may be what makes the difference between the mind resolved on awakening and the mind proceeding to awakening. (Brassard 2000 is a book-length study of the awakening mind and the BCA.)

It would appear, however, that possession of the mind resolved on awakening     is sufficient to make its possessor into a bodhisattva. The BCA, recall, suggests that it is intended to be ritually recited. Its reader develops the awakening mind while reciting the third chapter sincerely — saying “Therefore I will produce the awakening mind for the welfare of the world” (BCA III.23). Two verses later, the reciter, apparently not having done anything else in the intervening time, declares: “Today I have been born into the family of the buddhas; now I am a child of the buddhas,” which is to say a bodhisattva(BCA III.25).

This is not, of course, the end of the story. Such a beginning bodhisattva has just started on the path; he has a long task ahead of him. Śāntideva does not spell out the different levels of attainment that a bodhisattva may reach, but he suggests that he agrees with the account of ten stages (bhūmi) of a bodhisattva’s achievement, as set out in the Daśabhūmika Sūtra and followed in Candrakīrti’s Madhyamakâvatāra (see Sprung 1979 for a partial translation of, and commentary on, this latter text). The ŚS quotes the Daśabhūmika six times. In this context, Śāntideva distinguishes between “one who has entered a stage” (bhūmipraviṣṭa) and a beginning (ādikarmika) bodhisattva (ŚS 11), suggesting that beginning bodhisattvas have not even entered the first of the ten stages.

Notice, however, that the BCA’s reciter does not become a bodhisattva, even a beginning one, until taking the vow in the third chapter. So Śāntideva's audience, it would seem, is not limited to bodhisattvas — a point strengthened by the profuse praises of the awakening mind in the opening chapters of both texts. The reader who starts the text might not have generated the awakening mind, hence not have started trying to become a bodhisattva, and needs to be convinced of the importance of doing so.

The eighteenth chapter of the ŚS gives some account of the end of the path. It gives a fantastical description of the buddhas — their great beauty, virtue and power (ŚS 318-22). Shortly afterwards, it also describes the qualities of bodhisattvas in similar terms  and at greater length. It is difficult to imagine how a reader who had just become a bodhisattva, taking the vow, could see himself as described by these qualities — spontaneously emitting perfumes and garlands and pearls from his body, for example (ŚS 327) — so this is likely the culmination of a long period of effort, in the last stages of which one becomes a fully realized bodhisattva. The distinctions between buddhas and fully realized bodhisattvas are not clearly spelled out; one suspects that being one of these advanced bodhisattvas is almost as good as being an actual buddha.

3. Excellence in Means

To interpret Śāntideva's ethics in the BCA and ŚS, it is important to turn to the concept of excellence in means (upāyakauśalya). This common Mahāyāna concept is best known as a way of explaining the existence of other Buddhist traditions, as in texts like the Lotus Sūtra: the Buddha preached mainstream Buddhism as a clever way to reach people who were not ready to receive the superior teaching of the Mahāyāna. (See Pye 1978 for a book-length discussion.)

The term has a number of different senses in Buddhist tradition (see Harvey 2000, 134-40). Some Mahāyāna texts treat excellence in means as the seventh of ten perfections or virtues (pāramitā); Śāntideva does not do this, as he adheres to the conception that there are only six perfections (on which see below). For him, there are two senses in which the idea is important. The first is hermeneutical: different teachings are intended for people at different levels of ability, with the idea of ultimate truth at the very highest level (see BCA IX.2-8). For this reason the BCA is usually understood as a progressive text, leading its audience through progressively deeper levels of practice and understanding (e.g. see Crosby and Skilton 1995, 83-6). Śāntideva does not specifically use the term “excellence in means” to refer to this idea, although it is a common name for the idea in other Mahāyāna texts (Harvey 2000, 134). The second sense of the term is ethical; the idea most frequently comes up when he quotes the Upāyakauśalya Sūtra, a text which claims that bodhisattvas may break standard precepts or rules out of compassion. (The sūtra exists in Chinese and has been translated into English twice: Chang 1991, 427-68, and Tatz 1994.)

This second sense of excellence in means takes on considerable importance in contemporary discussions of Śāntideva's ethics (e.g. Clayton 2006, 102-9) because it is under this rubric that Śāntideva comes closest to addressing the “hard cases” so beloved of contemporary moral philosophy, such as situations when one seems called on to kill in order to prevent a greater evil. While discussing excellence in means, he explains that behaviors normally forbidden, including sexual activity, can be permitted out of compassion. So too, it is to explain the importance of excellence in means that Śāntideva notes that one is permitted to kill someone about to commit a grave wrong. The idea is important to this article for similar reasons, in that it seems to be a key principle involved in what we might call Śāntideva's casuistry — his examination of particular cases where different pieces of advice seem to collide.

For Śāntideva, a key component of excellence in means is that it is an excellence — a skill and a virtue which allows one to respond appropriately to difficult situations, if not a virtue on the official list of six perfections. There is no one formula or principle for action that Śāntideva sets out in advance (along the lines of “act to bring about the greatest happiness for the greatest number” or “act only according to that maxim you can also will to be a universal law”). As we will shortly see, there are definite elements of consequentialist reasoning in Śāntideva, but more often the bodhisattva is called on to exercise judgment, once his character is already well developed: When Śāntideva says that “even the forbidden is permitted,” it is specifically “for a compassionate one who has sight of the purpose” (BCA V.84); that is, it depends on the agent’s ability to exercise discretion in the name of compassion.

This level of discretion is evinced in the numerous places in Śāntideva's work where difficult cases are considered. When he approves of the killing of someone about to commit a grave wrong, he says only that there is “permission” (anujñāna), not that it must be done. Similarly, in the case of alcoholics, alcohol may be given; Śāntideva uses the gerundive form deya (ŚS 271), and the gerundive in -ya does not have the imperative force of the gerundive in -tavya.

Śāntideva explicitly refers to consequences in the case of giving a weapon: one may do so after the “consideration of good or bad consequences” (ŚS 271). This is still a consideration or reflection rather than a maximizing or weighing; “consideration,” vicāra, is literally “moving around (in the mind).” A weighing of some sort comes across in introducing the possibility that one might have sex out of compassion: “even then, if one should see a greater benefit (artha) to beings, one may discard the training” (ŚS 167). Some sort of consequentialist maximizing appears to be at work here. Clayton (2006, 107) suggests that such concern for consequences means that these “examples of upāya become problematic from the perspective of a virtue ethic.” However, for Śāntideva, any true “benefit” to other beings will ultimately be an increase in their virtue. Goodman (2008) argues strongly for a consequentialist interpretation of Śāntideva's ethics, but on the understanding that it is a “perfectionist consequentialism,” in which the consequences to be maximized consist of virtue in oneself and others.

4. Good and Bad Karma

The terms “good karma” and “bad karma,” respectively, translate the Sanskrit terms puṇya and pāpa. These terms appear very frequently in Śāntideva's work — often as justifications for acting and feeling in a certain way. They refer to a kind of ethical causality: the process by which ethically good and bad actions (respectively) have positive and negative results. These results most characteristically, but not exclusively, include better and worse rebirths. The Sanskrit terms parallel the English usage of “good and bad karma,” thought of as the way in which one’s good or bad actions come back to affect one positively or negatively in the future. This usage corresponds exactly to the meaning of the Buddhist terms puṇya and pāpa, even though those terms do not themselves involve the Sanskrit word karma or karman (which simply means “action”). There is, at any rate, no disputing the close connection between Sanskrit karma, on the one hand, and puṇya and pāpa on the other; the latter are typically referred to in Sanskrit as karmaphala, the fruits of action.

The concepts of good and bad karma are central to Śāntideva's thought. The ŚS is typically thought to be structured around the idea, presented inŚSK 4, that one should “protect, purify and enhance” one’s person, one’s possessions and one's good karma, though one should also be prepared to give all of these things away (Bendall 1970, xi). ŚS 356 connects each of these verbs to good and bad karma: to “protect” something is to prevent new karmically bad mental states (dharmas) related to it; to “purify” it is to reduce the existing karmically bad states related to it; and to “enhance” it is to increase the karmically good states related to it. (Mahoney 2002, 32-9 identifies the significance of these verbs with respect to the traditional Buddhist samyakprahānas or “right strivings”.) In a certain sense, one might see the ŚS as being all about good and bad karma — a sense strengthened by the long discussions of bad karma in ŚS III, IV and VIII, and of the good karma deriving from worship in ŚS XVII. In the BCA, too, the final chapter — the highest and most important, if one adheres strictly to a progressive understanding of the text — deals with the redirection (pariṇāmanā) of good karma. Dayal (1970, 189-90) goes so far as to say that Śāntideva substituted karmic redirection for metaphysical insight as the ultimate goal of the bodhisattva path. Clayton (2006, 83) and Lele (2007, 96-7) argue that Dayal’s claim is overstated, but neither dispute that good and bad karma are vitally important to Śāntideva's work. Clayton (2006, 67) identifies three terms closely related to good karma (kuśala, śīla and puṇya) as the most central ethical concepts in the ŚS, and even as “probably the most important ethical concepts in Indian Buddhism” more generally.

The redirection of good karma (often called “transference of merit”) is a central part of Śāntideva's understanding of karma’s workings. He urges his readers to redirect any good karma that they acquire, so that it does not merely result in a worldly form of well-being, such as a more prosperous rebirth for oneself. This redirection can sometimes be to ensure that the good karma brings one closer to awakening instead of worldly rebirths (bodhipariṇāmanā, ŚS 158); see Kajiyama 1989 for a discussion of this first form, which is often neglected in studies of karmic redirection. More frequently, though, it means the giving up of one’s good karma to others (puṇyotsarga). This is a common idea in Buddhist texts. Buddhist stories often emphasize the supernatural nature of karmic redirection. Especially, they commonly claim or imply that ghosts (pretas or petas) are incapable of receiving physical gifts. If one wishes to give them something, it must be one’s good karma(Kajiyama 1989, 7-8).

In contemporary philosophical terms, Śāntideva's idea of karma suggests, though not conclusively, an internal connection between virtue or ethical excellence and well-being. That is, he often uses these terms in a way that suggests that virtue is well-being in many significant senses. He does this by using puṇya in ways that make it equivalent both to virtue or excellence and to well-being or flourishing. Śāntideva uses the term for good karma (puṇya) interchangeably with the terms for good conduct (śīla) and excellence (kuśala) (see Lele 2007, 79-82)(Clayton 2006, 73). Even more frequently, however, he equates it with well-being or welfare, śubha, as Clayton (2006, 48-51) notes. This equivalence suggests a sense in which, on Śāntideva's understanding, good karma not only produces well-being, but is well-being — constitutive of a good life, at least at the level of conventional truth. There does remain some ambiguity, however, in the sense that Śāntideva's work also suggests that well-being is the product of the result or “ripening” (vipāka) of good karma.

This ambiguity may be compared to that in Greek conceptions of eudaimonia, which also means human welfare or flourishing, but includes a strong element of excellence (aretē) as well. To the extent that good karma is equated with excellence, Śāntideva's thought resembles that of the Stoics, who thought that excellence alone constituted well-being. To the extent that good karma is equated with the results of excellent action, however, it looks more like Aristotle’s view, where “external goods,” outside the control of the agent’s excellence or lack thereof, are intrinsic components of well-being. (See Greek Philosophy and Stoicism.) However, Śāntideva does not ever suggest, as Aristotle does, that everyone aims at well-being but not everyone knows what it is (NE 1095a).

However we interpret the relation between action and result, it would seem that for Śāntideva good karma, as a complex of virtue and well-being, effectively constitutes its own intrinsic reason for action, as eudaimonia does. That a given action or mental state is karmically good, and that it is good per se, seem to be one and the same; Śāntideva does not make claims of the form “one should refrain from an action or mental state in spite of the good karma it generates,” or “one should have an action or mental state even though it is karmically bad.” Amod Lele argues that “there are a number of cases where it would seem like Śāntideva is saying it is not good to have more good karma, but in nearly all such cases, he actually ends up saying that the apparent loss of good karma turns out to bring more good karma” (Lele 2007, 85-7, emphasis in original).

5. The Perfections

Śāntideva typically describes the bodhisattva in terms of his six “perfections” (pāramitās); e.g., ŚS 97, 187. The perfections are beneficial and valuable traits of character, similar to Aristotelian virtues or excellences. This article renders Śāntideva's term pāramitā as the literal “perfection” rather than as “virtue” because Śāntideva does discuss other virtues — beneficial traits of character — which are not themselves considered pāramitās, such as nonattachment and esteem.

The six perfections are nearly always arranged in ascending order: giving or generosity (dāna), good conduct (śīla), patient endurance (kṣānti), heroic strength (vīrya), meditation (dhyāna) and metaphysical insight (prajñā). An observer might be tempted to apply Aristotle’s classification  of the virtues  here and identify the first four as “moral” virtues, the sixth (and possibly the fifth) as “intellectual.” However, one should bear in mind the significance of Aristotle’s distinction: intellectual virtues are primarily attained through teaching, moral virtues through habituation (NE 1103a). Śāntideva does not distinguish the perfections in this regard; as we will see in the section on metaphysical insight below, in many ways it too is acquired through habituation.

The perfections are sufficiently important to Śāntideva's ethical thought that  both of his texts are to some extent structured around them. The final four perfections are explicitly identified, in turn, as the topics of the BCA’s chapters VI through IX. Patient endurance and heroic strength are also identified as the topics of ŚS chapters IX and X. While the first two perfections — giving or generosity (dāna) and good conduct (śīla) — do not receive their own chapter headings, they do have an important place in Śāntideva's ethical worldview, as we will see.

a. Giving

Śāntideva uses the term dāna to refer both to the act of giving, and to the perfection which might more idiomatically be rendered into English as generosity (dānapāramitā). He does not usually distinguish between the two. This article follows his usage and uses “giving” and “generosity” as synonyms.

Giving has relatively little role in the BCA except for its role in the redirection of good karma, mentioned above. In the ŚS, however, it takes pride of place. The first chapter of the ŚS closes by claiming that “giving alone is the bodhisattva’s awakening” (ŚS 34).  Richard Mahoney (2002), undertaking a detailed study of the ŚS’s structure, has demonstrated that the entire text is effectively organized around the idea of protecting, purifying and enhancing one’s person, possessions and good karma — culminating in giving each of these three things away.

Why is giving so important to Śāntideva? For him, giving serves at least three important and distinct purposes: first, the development of nonattachment; second, the “upward” expression of esteem (śraddhā); and third, “downward” compassionate benefit to others. Each of these three, for him, is an essential component of the bodhisattva path, and giving allows one to realize each component, though in different ways.

i. Giving as Giving Up

The first reason Śāntideva offers for giving is that one should not be attached to things in the first place; one should be ready to give them away. Śāntideva sometimes uses terms, utsarga and tyāga, which have both the sense of “giving” and of “renunciation.” By giving something to another person, one both demonstrates one’s own lack of attachment to it and minimizes the risk that it will cause future attachment. As a result, one generates a great deal of good karma. Here giving is primarily “giving up”; “giving to” is a secondary function. Śāntideva expresses this rationale for giving most forcefully in a long passage excerpted here:

What is given must no longer be guarded; what is at home must be guarded. What is given is [the cause] for the reduction of craving (triṣṇā); what is at home is the increase of craving. What is given is nonattachment (aparigraha); what is at home is with attachment (saparigraha). What is given is safe; what is at home is dangerous. What is given is [the cause] for supporting the path of awakening; what is at home is [the cause] for supporting Māra [the demonic tempter]. What is given is imperishable; what is at home is perishable. From what is given [comes] happiness; having obtained what is at home, [there is] suffering. (ŚS 19)

This passage indicates a common theme in Śāntideva's work, one more radical than some other Buddhist takes on attachment and possession. It is not merely that a bodhisattva should avoid attachment to possessions, but that the possessions are themselves potentially harmful, because having them creates a danger of increasing one’s attachment to them. Thus Śāntideva claims elsewhere that a bodhisattva “should have fear of material gain (lābha) and of honour,” (ŚSK 16) and that “great gain is among the obstacles to the Mahāyāna” (ŚS 145).

ii. Upward Gifts: Expressing Esteem

The second reason for giving is to express one’s esteem or trust (śraddhā) in beings who have achieved a higher level on the bodhisattva path. The term śraddhā has a number of different and related senses, usually blending together: esteem, trust, confidence, devotion, faith. Maria Hibbets’s (2000) rendering “esteem” may come closest overall to the sense in which Śāntideva uses the term, though it loses the important connotation of trust. Śraddhā, Śāntideva says, is the prasāda (peaceful pleasure) of an unsoiled mind, rooted in respect (gaurava, literally “weightiness,” like the Latin gravitas), without arrogance (ŚS 5). Those without esteem oppose or ridicule buddhas (ŚS 174). One with esteem will listen whenever the Buddha’s word is spoken (ŚS 15); esteem is that by which one approaches the noble ones (Buddhas) and does not do what should not be done (ŚS 316).

When a householder makes a gift to a monk, especially a gift of food, it is called a śraddhādeya, a gift by esteem (ŚS 137-8). Similarly, when the aspiring bodhisattva makes offerings to advanced bodhisattvas and buddhas as part of the seven-part Anuttarapūjā ritual worship in BCA II.10-19, the act expresses esteem. Śāntideva does not use the word śraddhā in this passage, but the feelings it evokes match his descriptions of esteem elsewhere: a pleasurable trust in more advanced beings, recognizing their status as more advanced, that leads to better actions. Just before describing the fabulous offerings he gives, Śāntideva's narrator describes the esteem he places in the buddhas and bodhisattvas and the good action that will result from doing so:

by becoming your possession, I am in a state of fearlessness; I make the well-being of all beings. I overcome previous bad karma and will make no further bad karma. (BCA II.9)

This esteem has deeply important benefits. It is a pleasure taken in good actions; it is “a maker of gladness about renunciation, a maker of excitement about the Jinas’ (Buddhas’) dharma” (ŚS 3). This combination of trust and pleasure leads one on to good action; as Śāntideva says, those who always have esteem toward a respectable Buddha will abandon neither good conduct nor training (ŚS 3). So the practice of esteem helps increase one’s good karma (ŚS 317).  Moreover, to encourage the growth of esteem in a giver, when an aspiring bodhisattva receives a gift, he encourages the giver and makes him feel excited about giving it (ŚS 150).

iii. Downward Gifts: Attracting Others

When one gives for either of the above reasons (expressing nonattachment or expressing esteem), one effectively does so for one’s own spiritual benefit. But Śāntideva also says that one gives to all beings (sarvasatvebhyas, ŚSK 4), for their enjoyment (ŚSK 5), adding that one also preserves the gift for the sake of their enjoyment (satvôpabhogārtham, ŚSK 6). Here he is advocating a different kind of giving, motivated by compassion and aimed at benefitting the recipient. The distinction between the second two types of giving corresponds to Maria Heim’s (Heim 2004, 74-5) distinction between “upward” and “downward” giving, out of esteem and out of compassion.

The reasons Śāntideva offers for downward giving are not as straightforward as they may first appear. For Śāntideva, the recipient of a gift benefits less from possessing the gift object, and more from receiving it in a gift encounter. When a bodhisattva gives a gift, he attracts the recipient to the bodhisattva path, so that the recipient is more likely to become a virtuous bodhisattva. The gift object itself provides little benefit, and could even be harmful (2007, 136-75).

As well as giving possessions and more conventional goods, one also gives good karma to others through its redirection (parināmanā), as noted above. Since Śāntideva tends to see good karma as intrinsically good, in this case the recipient is more likely to benefit from the gift itself. Even so, good karma involves a potential danger, since if it is not redirected it can lead merely to dangerous wealth rather than to awakening.

b. Good Conduct

Of all the perfections, Śāntideva tells us the least about the second one, śīla. This Sanskrit and Pali term has a general sense of “good conduct” or “good habits,” but its particular meaning is less clear. Unlike the final four perfections, it is not identified specifically as the single topic of a chapter in the BCA, and the chapters identified with it in the ŚS (II and V) make little reference to it. Unlike giving, it is not discussed at systematic length in either text. Śāntideva sometimes uses the term in a broad sense that would seem to encompass all of the perfections, to the point of using it interchangeably with puṇya, good karma, or śubha, well-being (Clayton 2006, 73). ŚS chapter V, entitled Śīlapāramitāyām Anarthavarjanam — abandoning of the worthless with respect to the perfection of good conduct — seems like a miscellany of topics, describing a wide variety of actions that Śāntideva endorses. A reader may then be tempted to take up the common usage in which this good conduct refers to “morality,” “virtue” or “ethics” in a general sense (see Clayton 2006, 72-3) — perhaps even a sense that includes the other perfections.

Yet Śāntideva does give some further specification of a way in which he understands “good conduct,” conceptually distinct from the other perfections, even though he does not stick consistently to this usage. His one reference to the perfection of good conduct in the BCA proclaims: “when the mind of cessation (viraticitta) is obtained, the perfection of good conduct is understood [to exist]” (BCAP 53). The ŚS specifies the goal of good conduct in a similar vein, but is more specific about what constitutes good conduct: “whichever practices are causes of meditative concentration (samādhi), those are included in good conduct” (ŚS 121). It seems that good conduct, when understood as a single perfection, consists primarily of practices that aid one to concentrate one’s mind and still its uncontrolled activity.

This suggestion is borne out by the content of the fifth BCA chapter, which, following up the claim about the mind of cessation, details exactly these sorts of practices. (Since this chapter comes immediately before the chapter on patient endurance — the third perfection — it would be a logical place for Śāntideva to discuss good conduct, the second perfection.) The chapter begins by warning the reader of the dangers of an unrestrained mind, comparing it to a mad, rutting elephant, and then specifies a number of practices that Śāntideva claims will help the mind remain under control.  We may imagine, then, that this chapter gives us some idea of what Śāntideva means by the perfection of good conduct.

The practices bear some resemblance to Buddhist monastic rules (vinaya), although they could all be followed by lay householders and the text does not restrict them to monks. Śāntideva urges his readers to walk with a downcast gaze, as if continually meditating, but notes that they may look outward to rest their eyes or to greet someone. One should look ahead (or behind) before moving there, he says, and think about one’s actions before undertaking them; one should continually observe the positioning of one’s body. Each of these actions, Śāntideva specifies, allows one to restrain the mind (BCA V.35-40). Similarly, one should avoid idle chatter, or purposeless nervous tics (BCA V.45-6). In general, as Susanne Mrozik notes, “Close careful attention to one’s bodily movements and gestures generates mindfulness and awareness. Disciplining the body is thus a means of disciplining one’s thoughts and feelings” (Mrozik 1998, 63).

Śāntideva notes that the relationship between good conduct and meditative concentration is two-way: “One aiming at meditative concentration should have good conduct, for mindfulness and introspection; so too, one aiming at good conduct should make effort at meditative concentration.” He claims that the “complete perfection of mental action” will comes from the two “mutually enhancing causes” that are good conduct and meditative concentration (ŚS 121).

The second half of the fifth BCA chapter involves details about bodily comportment which aim at pleasing others, rather than at focusing the mind; similar instructions are found in the sixth chapter of the ŚS. It is possible, though not clear, that Śāntideva also intends these to be included under good conduct. Śāntideva here enjoins etiquette of various kinds (do not spit in public, do not make noises while eating) and a pleasant tone of speaking (BCA V.71-96, ŚS 124-7). Mrozik (2007, 75-6) notes that such actions are intended to generate prasāda, a kind of peaceful pleasure, in those who observe the bodhisattva. Lele (2007, 151-9) suggests further that the goal of generating this prasāda is to attract them to the bodhisattva path, making them more likely to enter that path and increase their well-being.

c. Patient Endurance

Śāntideva divides patient endurance (kṣānti) into three major varieties: first, enduring suffering (duṣkhâdhivāsanakṣānti); second, dharmic patience, the patient endurance that comes from reflecting on the Buddha’s teaching, the dharma (dharmanidhyānakṣānti); and third, patience toward others’ wrongdoing (parâpakāramarṣanakṣānti, ŚS 179). The first, which Śāntideva opposes to frustration (daurmanasya), is closer to the English word “endurance”; the third, which Śāntideva opposes to anger (dveṣa), is closer to the English word “patience.” For this reason it is helpful to use a two-word term like “patient endurance” to encapsulate the idea of kṣānti as a whole. Śāntideva does not link these phenomena under the rubric of patient endurance merely for the sake of convenience or etymology; rather, patient endurance has common elements that pervade them all. In all three cases, one remains calm and even happy in the face of various undesired events — pains, frustrations, wrongs — that one might face.

Dharmic patience, the second variety — as Śāntideva describes it in BCA VI.22-32 — is juxtaposed against anger, and involves being patient with others’ bad actions. For this reason, it seems largely like a subtype of the third type, patience toward wrongdoing, which involves reflecting on the fact that their actions all have causes. Śāntideva likely treats the two as distinct in order to emphasize the particular importance of metaphysical reasons for patient endurance. In terms of the actions and mental dispositions that they entail, they do not appear to be different from each other. So we may here subsume this second variety under the third, except as otherwise specified.

There are at least two ways in which enduring suffering and patience toward wrongdoing are closely related in Śāntideva's work. First, there is a logical or analytical relationship. When one is wronged by others, it is likely to be an undesired event, and therefore experienced as suffering. So, effectively, the events that evoke patience toward wrongdoing are a subset of those that evoke the endurance of  suffering. The appropriate reactions are intertwined as well. We see this when Śāntideva discusses being the victim of theft. While he addresses theft in the context of anger, and more generally of patience toward wrongdoing, the reason he gives to remain patient is that possessions are dangerous to have anyway (BCA VI.100) — a central part of Śāntideva's justifications for nonattachment, which itself is very closely tied to enduring suffering.

Second, there is a causal relationship. Enduring suffering, as Śāntideva discusses it, requires that one fight frustration; patience toward wrongdoing requires that one fight anger. And both of Śāntideva's texts (ŚS 179 and BCA VI.7-8) note that anger feeds on frustration; so enduring suffering makes it easier to have patience toward wrongdoing.

i. Happiness from Enduring Suffering

Śāntideva's case for enduring suffering is relatively straightforward: one will feel less suffering and be happier. Early in his discussion of frustration (daurmanasya), Śāntideva makes the pragmatic point that it accomplishes little. So it is not only an unpleasant mental state, but an unnecessary one: “If indeed there is a remedy, then what’s the point of frustration? And if there is no remedy, then what’s the point of frustration?” (BCA VI.10).

Enduring suffering can lead to happiness, for Śāntideva, in a particularly extreme meditative state (samādhi). He refers to this state as the sarvadharmasukhakrānta, “making happiness toward all phenomena.” The passage describing this meditative state is one of the most provocative in the entire ŚS. Śāntideva says that “for a bodhisattva who has obtained this meditative state, with respect to all sense objects, pain is felt as happiness indeed, not as suffering or as indifference” (ŚS 181). He proceeds to describe a panoply of graphic tortures in a startlingly upbeat manner. For example:

[The bodhisattva who has attained this meditative state], while being fried in oil, or while pounded like pounded sugarcane, or while crushed like a reed, or while being burned in the way that oil or ghee or yogurt are burned — has a happy thought arisen. (ŚS 181)

While a reader might cringe at the literal masochism in this passage, it is also not hard to see the power of its appeal: It strongly suggests that a bodhisattva can be happy anywhere, any time, in any condition. And there is a particular practice that the bodhisattva pursues to reach this state. Whenever he is subjected to such an unpleasant fate, he makes a mental determination or vow (pranidhāna) that everyone, from those who honor him to those who torture him, should reach the great awakening (ŚS 182). In the BCA he suggests starting with small pains to learn to endure bigger ones: “because of the practice of mild distress, even great distress is tolerable” (BCA VI.14). Prajñākaramati draws a direct connection between the two, quoting the ŚS passage in his commentary on the BCA verse.

ii. The Case Against Anger

Śāntideva's arguments for patience toward wrongdoing consist of arguments against anger, against which this patience is juxtaposed. He lays out these arguments primarily in the sixth chapter of the BCA; for a detailed commentary on this chapter, see Thurman 2004. His arguments here derive from premises both naturalistic and supernaturalistic: “One who destroys anger is happy in this world and the next” (BCA VI.6).

Śāntideva's naturalistic arguments against anger rest first on psychological grounds: “The mind does not get peace, nor enjoy pleasure and happiness, nor find sleep or satisfaction, when the dart of anger rests in the heart” (BCA VI.3). This set of psychological claims has a strong intuitive plausibility, in our context as well as his; it is probably not difficult for anyone to remember times that anger has negatively affected her peace of mind or pleasure or sleep.

Beyond this, Śāntideva seeks to minimize the significance of others’ wrongdoing (apakāra). He is especially concerned to neutralize insults and the destruction of praise. He asks: “The gang of contempt, harsh speech and infamy does not bind my body. Why, O mind, do you get enraged by it?” (BCA VI.53)

Śāntideva also offers severe warnings concerning the karmic consequences of anger. There is no bad karma equal to anger, he says, so patient endurance is the most effective means to reduce bad karma (BCA VI.2). He warns that anger leads to suffering in the hell realms far greater than the suffering that originally provoked the anger:

If suffering merely here and now cannot be endured, why is anger, the cause of distress in hell, not restrained? In the same way, for the sake of anger I have been placed in hells thousands of times; I have done this neither for my own sake nor for anyone else’s. (BCA VI.73-4)

There is only one kind of anger that Śāntideva seems to approve of, effectively an exception that proves the rule. He approves of anger when it is directed at anger itself: “Let anger toward anger be my choice” (BCA VI.41). More generally, he suggests elsewhere that anger at “my enemies, craving, anger and so on” (BCA IV.28) might be valuable: “Lodged in my own mind, these well-stood ones still harm me. In this very case I do not get angry. Damn, what unsuitable patience (sahiṣṇutā)!” (BCA IV.29).

Śāntideva also makes the case for dharmic patience (dharmanidhyānakṣānti) in BCA VI.22-32; this, as mentioned earlier, is patience toward wrongdoing which is informed by metaphysical insight. Śāntideva's point here is that the emotion of anger comes out of an incorrect belief about the world — namely that other agents can appropriately be blamed for their actions. “I have no anger at my bile and so on, though they make great suffering. Why is there anger at sentient beings? They too are angry due to a cause” (BCA VI.22). Anger, whether my own or another’s, has its causes. It is not chosen; it is merely another product of the universe’s dependent arising (BCA VI.23-26). Moreover, there is no self which is capable of being an agent of anger (BCA VI.27-30). And “therefore, whether one has seen an enemy or a friend doing something wrong, having considered that the act has causes, one should become happy” (BCA VI.33). Mark Siderits (2005) refers to this argument for dharmic patience as “paleo-compatibilist,” and suggests that it can help resolve contemporary debates on free will and determinism.

These arguments against anger are phrased in terms that could convince someone not already on the path. Other arguments are directed specifically at bodhisattvas. As has been mentioned before, it is crucial for the bodhisattva to win beings over; and anger interferes with this activity, where desire (rāga) might be able on some occasions to help with it. This is why anger, in Śāntideva's eyes, is far worse than desire, though desire and anger are both afflictions (kleṣas) that cloud the mind and lead one on to suffering (ŚS 164).

He claims further that “bodhisattvas who are not excellent in means (upāyakuśala) fear downfalls connected with desire (rāga); bodhisattvas who are excellent in means fear downfalls connected with anger, not downfalls connected with desire” (ŚS 164-5). Excellence in means (upāyakauśalya), the ability to teach others in the appropriate way to bring them onto the path, is deeply hindered by anger. Unlike desire, anger has no saving graces. Anger both creates suffering for oneself and interferes with one’s ability to benefit others; this is why nothing is as karmically bad as anger, or as karmically good as patient endurance.

d. Heroic Strength

Śāntideva devotes relatively little attention to the fourth perfection, heroic strength (vīrya). Each of his texts has a short chapter (BCA VII and ŚS X) devoted to it; parallel discussions occur in the fourth chapter of the BCA. He defines heroic strength as “excellent effort” (kuśalotsaha, BCA VII.2), effort that is both skillful and virtuous — a tireless striving on the bodhisattva path. In BCA VII, he contrasts heroic strength with laziness (ālasya, BCA VII.3). The primary point of BCA VII is to insist on the urgency of the bodhisattva’s task. It is rare to be born as a human, and a short human life leaves one with little time for adequate spiritual development, so it is crucial to devote oneself wholeheartedly to the task.

ŚS X, the shortest chapter in the text — a mere four pages — explains the importance of listening to sacred texts (śruta). The topic is surprising, since it seems tangentially related, at best, to the more straightforward heroic strength addressed in BCA VII. The connection seems to be that, to listen to sacred texts properly, one must do so tirelessly. If one does not do so, Śāntideva claims, even a sacred text can lead to  "destruction" (vināśa), probably because one reads and applies the text too selectively (ŚS 189).

e. Meditation

The fifth perfection, discussed in BCA VIII and ŚS XI-XIII, is meditation (dhyāna). Meditation for Śāntideva is very much an intellectual and even philosophical exercise, not merely a stilling of the mind; some of Śāntideva's most famous arguments appear in a context of discussions of meditation. Śāntideva emphasizes that a calming and stilling of the mind is essential to meditation, and enjoins his reader to flee society and find a solitary spot in the wilderness in order to achieve the proper degree of undistracted calm (BCA VIII.1-40, ŚS 193-201). But becoming calm and solitary, in both texts, is only the first step to grasping arguments and transformative techniques with an explicit cognitive content.

In the BCA, the first meditation that Śāntideva describes sharpens his emphasis on solitude: one considers the foulness of the human body. Specifically, his male audience is urged to reflect on the foulness of a potential female lover. He notes that the beloved will invariably become a corpse, highlights the repulsiveness of corpses, and asks the reader rhetorically why the living beloved seems any less repulsive (VIII.41-7). He then calls attention to the repulsiveness of the body’s waste products, natural smells, and fluids (VIII.48-71). Next he notes the great effort one must take in finding and keeping a lover, and the ultimate vanity of such efforts (VIII.72-83).

This meditation takes on a strongly misogynist tone, describing as it does the repulsiveness of female bodies. A contemporary reader should keep in mind its intent as a critique of lust, the passion which so easily distracts the mind from the bodhisattva’s path. While the argument is phrased in terms of the foulness of a woman’s body, its logic would apply equally well to the foulness of a man’s body, if imagined by a heterosexual female or homosexual male meditator. (Śāntideva never inverts the argument this way himself. As Wilson 1996 notes, historically Buddhists have never turned the arguments about female foulness around to have it apply to men, even when speaking to a female audience. The point is noted here to stress the relevance of these meditations for a contemporary philosophical audience, rightly skeptical of misogynistic claims.) The ideal to achieve in this lifetime, for Śāntideva, is that of a male or female monk who forswears lust and sexuality, and he calls attention to the body’s repulsive aspects in order to convince his readers of this ideal’s value.

i. Equalization of Self and Other

The two meditations which follow in BCA VIII, on the relationship between oneself and another, are Śāntideva's most famous. The first of these is known as the equalization of self and other (parātmasamatā). In this meditation Śāntideva argues for an ethical conclusion from a metaphysical premise: because the self is empty and unreal, it makes little sense to protect only oneself from suffering and not others.

The arguments are framed against a hypothetical objector (pūrvapakṣin) who wishes to prevent only his own suffering, but not that of others. Suffering here has a strong normative force; that suffering is bad and worthy of prevention is taken as self-evident, and Śāntideva assumes that his readers will share that assumption. When an imagined objector asks why suffering should be prevented at all, he responds, “No one disputes that!” (BCA VIII.103) If we substitute “the absence of suffering” for “pleasure,” Śāntideva's claim here seems to work like Alasdair MacIntyre’s interpretation of Mill’s claim that we know pleasure is desirable because men desire it:

He treats the thesis that all men desire pleasure as a factual assertion which guarantees the success of an ad hominem apeal to anyone who denies his conclusion. If anyone denies that pleasure is desirable, then we can ask him, But don’t you desire it? and we know in advance that he must answer yes, and consequently must admit that pleasure is desirable. (MacIntyre 1966, 239)

To deny that suffering should be prevented at all, in other words, is to argue in bad faith: anyone who makes such a claim does not really believe it. It is not hard to see the intuitive force of Śāntideva's claim about suffering; while one might come up with exceptions, in general most human beings in most contexts have viewed suffering as something bad and undesirable.

The selfish objector is right, then, to believe that suffering should be prevented. Where he goes awry is in focusing only on his own suffering; this focus turns out to be absurd. There is no self that endures from moment to moment, so one’s own future self is as different from one’s present self as other beings are: “If [someone else] is not protected because his suffering cannot hurt me — the sufferings of a future body are not mine. Why is that hurt protected against?” (BCA VIII.97) Śāntideva's arguments here have been compared to those of Derek Parfit (1984), who also attacks the metaphysical premise of selfhood as a premise for an altruistic ethics.

Paul Williams (1998a, 30) notes that most commentators, including Prajñākaramati, have read this verse so that the “future body” (āgāmikāya) means only the bodies one will inhabit in future rebirths, not the future state of one’s body in the present life. A literal reading of this verse and the next would suggest that they are right; the next verse adds that “one is dead, a very different other one is born” (BCA VIII.98). So Williams thinks that “from a textual point of view” this verse must be correct. However, later Tibetan commentators, especially rGyal tshab rje, interpret the verse so that it could refer to any present suffering one might try to prevent (Williams 1998a, 32-6). The “death” and “birth” would likely then refer to the body’s non-enduring nature — dying as the present moment passes away and being born anew in the following moment — rather than to literal death and rebirth. Logically this seems a more satisfying reading. The argument seems entirely superfluous if it refers only to future births; based on everything else that Śāntideva says, one concerned with better future births should, above all, prevent the suffering of others.

Śāntideva makes an additional argument beyond the point about future selves. Even the present self should be broken up into its parts. When the opponent objects that one who suffers should only prevent the suffering that belongs to him, Śāntideva retorts: “The foot’s suffering is not the hand’s. Why does [the hand] protect [the foot]?” (BCA VIII.99)

Williams (1998b) has attempted to refute Śāntideva's arguments against egoism, claiming that the concept of suffering or pain makes little sense without a subject or self to feel the suffering. Williams’s refutation has been controversial, provoking Barbra Clayton (Clayton 2001), John Pettit (1999) and Mark Siderits (Siderits 2000) all to defend Śāntideva's claims.

Why do these arguments appear in the chapter on meditation, when the primary focus of that chapter seems to concern the kind of metaphysical insight that is the topic of the following chapter? Two reasons suggest themselves. First, the arguments prepare the audience for the more imaginatively focused practice of the exchange and self and other. Second, as Crosby and Skilton suggest(1995, 84-5), these meditations derive from Cittamātra (Yogācāra) metaphysical views on the ultimate equivalence of self and other.   Śāntideva considers these Cittamātra views to be only a step on the road to the highest Madhyamaka view (see BCA IX). These arguments, then,  are really true only at the level of conventional truth, not at the level of wordless ultimate reality, the object of real metaphysical insight.

ii. Exchange of Self and Other

The last meditation in the chapter is called the exchange of self and other (parātmaparivartana). In it, Śāntideva attempts to put the equalization of self and other into practice, even taking it a step further to dissolve all the meditator’s vestiges of egoism. Here he urges his readers to create “a sense of self in inferiors and others, and a sense of other in oneself,” (VIII.140) to literally form a concept of “I” (ahamkāra) with respect to others, just as one would do with respect to the “drops of semen and blood” (VIII.158) which created the entity that one would normally consider a self. The intervening verses manifest this idea in practice. Here Śāntideva switches pronouns and grammatical persons so that the third person refers to the meditator and the first person to “others.” The new “I” that is the others can then feel envy and contempt toward the “he” that was oneself.

One now imagines how “he” — that is, oneself — seems happy, wealthy and praised, while “I” — others — “am” miserable, poor and despised; “I” should envy “him” (BCA VIII.141-2). Having imagined oneself from the viewpoint of an envious inferior, one then imagines the inverse viewpoint of a contemptuous superior:

We joyous ones see him finally mistreated, and the mocking laughter of all the people here and there. That wretch even had a rivalry with me! . . . Even if he were to have wealth, we should take it forcibly, having given him a mere pittance, if he does any work for us. And he should be caused to fall from happiness. (BCA VIII.150-4)

This sadomasochistic advice and the play of pronouns work together to end  feelings of egoism or attachment to self. Meditating in this way, one comes to live entirely for others.

iii. Meditations Against the Three Poisons

The above meditations from the BCA, while Śāntideva's most famous, are not the only meditations that he prescribes. In the ŚS, after briefly advising solitude and the control of thoughts, Śāntideva presents in turn three meditations intended to counter the three mental “poisons” which, in Buddhist thought, are responsible for suffering: desire (rāga), anger (dveṣa) and delusion (moha).

Against desire, Śāntideva describes a meditation on the foulness of the body, as in the BCA (ŚS 209-12).  To counteract anger, Śāntideva prescribes the practice of friendliness or love (maitrī, ŚS 212-19). This practice takes a number of forms, but the most notable is the redirection (parināmanā) of good karma toward others’ benefit. (This will be discussed below under “good and bad karma.”) Such acts are discussed at a number of places in Śāntideva's texts; at ŚS 213-16 he specifically refers to the practice of friendliness, which is intended to counteract anger. The way that one redirects good karma, in practice, is through an expressly stated wish: for example, “Whoever is suffering distress of body or mind in any of the ten directions — may they obtain oceans of happiness and joy through my good karma” (BCA X.2). This rationale for karmic redirection could apply even to those skeptical whether a supernatural process of karmic causality will actually work: by regularly wishing that one’s own good deeds will benefit others’ well-being, one can at least diminish the anger that one feels toward them.

Finally, to counteract delusion, one meditates on dependent origination (pratītyasamutpāda), the Buddhist theory that all things come to exist in dependence upon other causes (ŚS 219-28). This meditation leads into Śāntideva's discussion of the final perfection, metaphysical insight.

f. Metaphysical Insight

The sixth and final perfection in Śāntideva's thought is prajñā, a complex term which this article renders as “metaphysical insight.” The term “insight” emphasizes the depth and transformative nature of this knowledge — as we will see, Śāntideva makes strong claims about the effects that prajñā has on its possessor, so that it is classified as a perfection alongside patient endurance and restrained good conduct. The term “metaphysical” emphasizes the specific content of this knowledge: claims about the nature of reality. This is a relatively loose and nontechnical sense of the term “metaphysics” that one may find in introductory textbooks on philosophy — for example, “Metaphysics is the attempt to say what reality is” (Solomon 2006, 113). This section begins with a discussion of the ideas and arguments that Śāntideva includes as the content of metaphysical insight, and then proceeds to discuss their significance for ethics and the conduct of life.

i. Content

Śāntideva's views on metaphysics follow those of the Madhyamaka school of thought, associated with Nāgārjuna. (See Nagarjuna and Madhyamaka Buddhism for more detail.) For Madhyamaka, all things, especially the self, are empty (śūnya) and dependently originated (pratītyasamutpanna) — they have no essential or abiding existence. Tibetan tradition has typically associated Śāntideva with the more radical Prāsangika Mādhyamika school, as his metaphysical arguments follow their approach of reductio ad absurdum (prasanga) argument rather than the independent syllogisms (svatantra) of the Svātantrika school. On the other hand, Akira Saito (1996, 261) has argued that “we cannot be too careful” in using the term Prāsangika with reference to Śāntideva.  (See McClintock and Dreyfus 2002 for a discussion of the distinction between the Prāsangika and Svātantrika schools.)

Śāntideva's metaphysics is widely studied and commented on, both in Tibetan tradition and in the West. (For Tibetan commentaries see Dalai Lama XIV 1988; Palden and Seunam 1993. For Western commentaries see Oldmeadow 1994; Sweet 1977.) Nevertheless, the content of Śāntideva's metaphysics does not seem particularly original; as Michael Sweet’s book-length study of Śāntideva's metaphysics notes,

we do not find that his philosophical concerns or patterns of argumentation differ in any significant manner from those of Nāgārjuna, and especially from those of Candrakīrti, the great systematizer of the Prāsangika-Mādhyamika who preceded Śāntideva by at least a century. (Sweet 1977, 14)

Where Śāntideva's approach innovates is in the way that he draws ethical conclusions directly from his metaphysical premises. Many Buddhist texts draw soteriological conclusions of some sort from metaphysical premises — the nature of the universe is such that everyday life is filled with suffering but one can be liberated from it. Moreover, texts often draw ethical conclusions from these soteriological ideas. So in earlier texts there is an indirect connection from metaphysics to ethics by way of soteriology. Śāntideva, on the other hand, argues directly from metaphysics to advice about conduct in life, in a way that is relatively unusual in South Asian Buddhist literature. One exception is Candrakīrti himself, who derives ethical conclusions from metaphysics in his Catuhṣataka commentary (see Lang 2003), though his approach to doing so is significantly different from Śāntideva's.

Śāntideva's prasanga arguments avoid foundational claims, in the stricter sense of attempts to definitively establish a position from which other claims can be deduced. Any such position would itself be considered empty and therefore in some sense flawed. Indeed, an earlier Madhyamaka text, the Vigrahavyāvartani of Nāgārjuna, famously refuted its opponents by proclaiming: “If I had any position, then I would have a flaw [in my argument]. But I have no position; therefore I have no flaw at all” (VV 29). Rather, the approach is intended to be purely dialectical and critical, examining alternative positions and knocking them down, as Śāntideva does in BCA IX. Because Śāntideva is deconstructing concepts and deriving ethical significance from this deconstruction, William Edelglass (2007) compares his philosophy to that of Emmanuel Lévinas.

Claims to have no position may seem absurd at first glance, especially when associated with a thinker like Śāntideva who seems to make many positive claims about how one should live. Śāntideva's response relies on the central Madhyamaka distinction between conventional (samvriti) and ultimate (paramārtha) truth (e.g. BCA IX.2). The ultimate truth is inexpressible (anabhilāpya), untaught (adeṣita) and unmanifest (aprakāśita, ŚS 256); it is nonconceptual, and therefore nonrational. But because we are caught up in illusion, seeing substance, we still need to make provisional statements at a conventional level to make ourselves and others aware of this illusion and free ourselves from it. Since the ultimate truth is inexpressible, all of Śāntideva's actual claims need to be understood at the conventional level.

The above is what Śāntideva appears to say in his own words, at any rate. It is worth noting here that the Tibetan dGe lugs (Geluk) school argues that such claims cannot be taken literally and that in fact the ultimate truth is accessible to the intellect, although other commentators from the Sa skya (Sakya) and rNying ma (Nyingma) schools accept a more literal interpretation like the one I have just provided (Sweet 1977, 20).

The distinction between ultimate and conventional truth lends support to a number of Śāntideva's practical arguments. Especially, it supports his self-interested case for altruism on the grounds of the bodhisattva’s happiness: “All who are suffering in the world [are suffering] because of desire for their own happiness. All who are happy in the world [are happy] because of desire for others’ happiness” (BCA VIII.129). Śāntideva does not explain how this psychological claim is supposed to work. Lele (2007, 65-6) ties the claim to Śāntideva's theory of nonattachment (aparigraha); concern for oneself and one’s own particular interests leads to painful feelings of grief, loss, and fear when, as inevitably happens, those interests are harmed. But however such arguments are supposed to work, they would seem to be undercut by another claim of Śāntideva's: namely, that bodhisattvas still suffer in a sense, because of their compassion for others. He claims: “Just as one whose body is on fire has no joy at all, even through all pleasures, exactly so there is no way to joy with respect to the distress of beings, for those made of compassion” (BCA VI.123; see also ŚS 156, 166).

The distinction between conventional and ultimate, however, helps one resolve this apparent problem -- for the claim that bodhisattvas suffer is made merely at the conventional level of truth. Śāntideva argues that suffering itself is unreal (BCA IX.88-91); and only one who realizes the ultimate truth, it seems, will be able to really recognize this unreality. This recognition is the way in which it is possible for suffering to end, as the Third Noble Truth of Buddhism promises. It is also probably part of the reason that Śāntideva proclaims that happy people are happy because they desire others’ happiness — a bodhisattva, who has lost the illusion of self, can also lose the illusion of suffering and thereby escape it.

If suffering is unreal, however, one may wonder why it should be prevented. A similar worry applies to good and bad karma. Śāntideva claims, after all, that good and bad karma themselves arise out of illusion (BCA IX.11); like everything else we can speak of, they are ultimately empty. Clayton (2006, 97-8) argues that this point implies that ethical action, good karma, or eliminating suffering are unnecessary or insignificant. She quotes Richard Hayes (1994, 38) to the effect that maintaining a sense of the importance of ethics in such a philosophy is merely “philosophical rigour and integrity being compromised by the perceived need to preserve a social institution.” She finds herself “not quite cynical enough” to doubt Śāntideva's sincerity in accordance with Hayes’s quote, but provides no alternative explanation for why Śāntideva might have still believed in ethical action. Lele (2007, 89-90) argues to the contrary that Śāntideva maintains his philosophical integrity through the conventional-ultimate distinction. Ultimately good and bad karma are unreal, but they are very real at the conventional level. Most people remain trapped in the conventional level, where suffering occurs, and so they experience the suffering as real. For them, it is this conventional level of truth that matters.

ii. Practical Implications

Metaphysical insight has three major ethical and soteriological implications for Śāntideva, some of which we have already seen. First, knowing the nonexistence of self will lead one to benefit others. Second, one who knows dependent origination can become more patient with others’ wrongdoing, because he will know to avoid blaming them. Finally, “one who knows emptiness is not emotionally attached to worldly phenomena, because he is independent [of them]” (ŚS 264); recognizing the emptiness of things allows one to attach less significance to them.

These implications, for Śāntideva, are not merely a matter of logical implication. There is also a practical, cause-and-effect relationship between one’s realization of the metaphysical claims and one’s actions and mental states. For this reason Luis Gómez (1994, 121) notes that the closing verses of BCA IX “leave no room for doubt that we are dealing with a technology of the self” which is also a philosophical discourse. The passage quoted above does not merely state that one who knows emptiness also knows that he should not be emotionally attached to worldly phenomena; it states further that he himself is not in fact so attached (na samhriyate). Elsewhere in the text Śāntideva makes other, similar, causal claims that metaphysical insight will cause one to feel and act differently. For example, after having made a series of logical arguments for the equivalence of self and other, he immediately comes to add: “Those whose mental dispositions are developed in this way (evam), for whom the suffering of others is equal to their loves, go down into the Avīci hell like geese [into] a lotus pond” (BCA VIII.107, emphasis added). The "in this way" (Sanskrit evam) indicates that the logical arguments themselves are a way to develop mental dispositions; hearing these arguments is the thing that develops one’s mind to treat others’ suffering equally to one’s own. Metaphysical insight is not merely an idea added to a stock of knowledge, with which one can do as one pleases; it has direct consequences for one’s emotional states.

Such a view seems perplexing to contemporary Western ears, including some informed by Buddhism. Understanding ideas often seems not to have this liberating effect. David Burton puts the problem well, in terms of his personal experience:

I do not seem to be ignorant about the impermanence of entities. I appear to understand that entities have no fixed essence and that they often change in disagreeable ways. I seem to understand that what I possess will fall out of my possession. I apparently accept that all entities must pass away. And I seem to acknowledge that my craving causes suffering. Yet I am certainly not free from craving and attachment. . . . How, then, might one preserve the common Buddhist claim that knowledge of the three characteristics of existence [i.e. nonself, impermanence and suffering] results in liberation in the face of this objection? (Burton 2004, 31)

Burton explores several potential hypotheses to resolve his question. He labels the hypothesis which seems to come closest to Śāntideva's view as “insufficient attentiveness and reflection.” That is, that for those who have not experienced the beneficial ethical, emotional or soteriological consequences that are presumed to accrue from knowledge of Buddhist ideas, their belief in such ideas “is something they have thought about from time to time perhaps, but they do not bring it to mind often enough” (Burton 2004, 48-9).

Śāntideva suggests such a hypothesis in two ways. First, he frequently mentions the shifting and changing nature of the mind; for example, he notes that the mind is “like a river flow, unstable, broken up and dissolved when produced,” and “like lightning, unsteadily cut off in a moment” (ŚS 234). Second, within the chapter of the BCA on metaphysical insight, he speaks of “cultivating,” or meditating on, arguments: “this reasoning (vicāra) is meditated on as an antidote to that [fixation on imagination]” (BCA IX.92). This point is reinforced elsewhere in the text; as we have seen, his most famous metaphysical argument, on the equivalence of self and other (BCA VIII.90-119), occurs in the context of a particular meditation, within the BCA’s chapter on meditation (dhyāna). It is not enough, for Śāntideva, to find an argument persuasive and then move on to other things; it must be fixed in one’s mind.

6. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Works

BCA --- Śāntideva, Bodhicaryāvatāra. Edition: Bodhicaryāvatāra of Śāntideva with the commentary Pañjikā of Prajñākaramati; ed. P.L. Vaidya (1960), Buddhist Sanskrit Texts XII, Darbhanga, India: Mithila Institute. References given are to chapter and verse numbers.

BCAP --- Prajñākaramati, Bodhicaryāvatārapañjikā. Edition: Bodhicaryāvatāra of Śāntideva with the commentary Pañjikā of Prajñākaramati; ed. P.L. Vaidya (1960), Buddhist Sanskrit Texts XII, Darbhanga, India: Mithila Institute. Page references given are to the Poussin edition (listed with “P” in the Vaidya edition’s margins).

NE --- Aristotle, Nicomachean Ethics. Edition: J. Bywater, available for download and online search at as of 14 Aug 2007.

ŚS --- Śāntideva, Śikṣāsamuccaya. Edition: Çikshāsamuccaya: a compendium of Buddhistic teachings, compiled by Çāntideva chiefly from earlier Mahāyāna sūtras; ed. Cecil Bendall (1970), Bibliotheca Buddhica I, Osnabruck, Germany: Biblio Verlag.

ŚSK --- Śāntideva, Śikṣāsamuccaya Kārikā, in the Bendall edition of the ŚS above.

VV --- Nāgārjuna, Vigrahavyāvartani. Edition: Vigrahavyāvartani of Nāgārjuna: Sanskrit Text, eds. Christian Lindtner and Richard Mahoney (2003), available for download at as of 14 Aug 2007.

b. Translations Cited

  • Bendall, Cecil. 1970. Introduction. In Çikshāsamuccaya: A Compendium of Buddhistic Teaching Compiled By Çāntideva Chiefly From Earlier Mahāyāna-Sūtras. Osnabrück: Biblio Verlag.
  • Crosby, Kate, and Andrew Skilton. 1995. The Bodhicaryāvatāra: A New Translation. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Wallace, Vesna A., and B. Alan Wallace, eds. 1997. A Guide to the Bodhisattva Way of Life. Ithaca, NY: Snow Lion.

c. General Studies of Śāntideva

  • Brassard, Francis. 2000. The Concept of Bodhicitta in Śāntideva's Bodhicaryāvatāra. Albany, NY: State University of New York Press.
  • Clayton, Barbra. 2006. Moral Theory in Śāntideva's Śikṣāsamuccaya: Cultivating the Fruits of Virtue. London and New York: RoutledgeCurzon.
  • Cooper, David E., ed. 1998. Ethics: The Classic Readings. Oxford: Blackwell Publishers.
  • Dayal, Har. 1970. The Bodhisattva Doctrine in Buddhist Sanskrit Literature. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass.
  • Griffiths, Paul J. 1999. Religious Reading: The Place of Reading in the Practice of Religion. Oxford, UK: Oxford University Press.
  • Gyatso, Geshe Kelsang. 1986. Meaningful to Behold: A Commentary to Shantideva's Guide to the Bodhisattva's Way of Life. London: Tharpa Publications.
  • Harvey, Peter. 2000. An Introduction to Buddhist Ethics: Foundations, Values and Issues. Cambridge, UK: Cambridge University Press.
  • Hedinger, Jürg. 1984. Aspekte der Schulung in der Laufbahn eines Bodhisattva: Dargestellt nach dem Śikṣāsamuccaya des Śāntideva. Wiesbaden: Otto Harrassowitz.
  • Lele, Amod. 2007. Ethical Revaluation in the Thought of Śāntideva. Unpublished PhD dissertation, Harvard University.
  • Mahoney, Richard. 2002. Of the Progress of the Bodhisattva: The Bodhisattvamārga in the Śikṣāsamuccaya. University of Canterbury.
  • Pezzali, Amalia. 1968. Śāntideva: Mystique Bouddhiste Des Viie Et Viiie Siècles. Florence: Vallecchi Editore.
  • Rinpoche, Thrangu. 2002. A Guide to the Bodhisattva's Way of Life of Shantideva: A Commentary. Delhi: Sri Satguru Publications.
  • Tobden, Geshe Yeshe. 2005. The Way of Awakening: A Commentary on Shantideva's Bodhicharyavatara. Somerville, MA: Wisdom.
  • Williams, Paul. 1995. General Introduction: Śāntideva and His World. In The Bodhicaryāvatāra. Ed. Kate Crosby, and Andrew Skilton, Oxford: Oxford University Press.

d. Specialized Studies

  • Clayton, Barbra. 2001. Compassion as a Matter of Fact: The Argument From No-Self to Selflessness in Śāntideva's Śikṣāsamuccaya. Contemporary Buddhism 2 (1): 83-97.
  • Dalai Lama XIV. 1988. Transcendent Wisdom: A Commentary on the Ninth Chapter of Śāntideva's Guide to the Bodhisattva Way of Life. Ithaca, NY: Snow Lion.
  • de Jong, J.W. 1975. La légende de Śāntideva. Indo-Iranian Journal 16 (3): 161-82.
  • de Rachewiltz, Igor. 1996. The Mongolian Tanjur Version of the Bodhicaryāvatāra, Edited and Transcribed, With a Word-Index and a Photo-Reproduction of the Original Text (1748). Wiesbaden, Germany: Harrassowitz.
  • Edelglass, William. 2007. Ethics and the Subversion of Conceptual Reification in Lévinas and Śāntideva. In Deconstruction and the Ethical in Asian Thought. Ed. Youru Wang, London and New York: Routledge.
  • Gómez, Luis O. 1994. Presentations of Self: Personal Dimensions of Ritualized Speech. In Other Selves: Autobiography and Biography in Cross-Cultural Perspective. Ed. Phyllis Granoff, and Koichi Shinohara, Oakville, ON and Buffalo, NY: Mosaic Press.
  • Gómez, Luis O. 1999. The Way of the Translators: Three Recent Translations of Śāntideva's Bodhicaryāvatāra. Buddhist Literature 1 262-354.
  • Goodman, Charles. 2008. Consequentialism, Agent-Neutrality, and Mahāyāna Ethics. Philosophy East and West 58 (1): 17-35.
  • Harrison, Paul. 2007. The Case of the Vanishing Poet: New Light on Śāntideva and the Śikṣā-Samuccaya. In Festschrift für Michael Hahn, zum 65. Geburtstag von Freunden und Schülern Überreicht. Ed. Konrad Klaus, and Jens-Uwe Hartmann. Vienna: Arbeitskreis für Tibetische und Buddhistische Studien.
  • Kanaoka, S. 1963. Regional Characteristics of Mongolian Buddhism: A Study on the Basis of the "Bodhicaryāvatāra". Bukkyo Shigaku 10 (4): 15-24.
  • Palden, Khentchen Kunzang, and Minyak Kunzang Seunam. 1993. Comprendre La Vacuité: Deux Commentaires Du Chapitre Ix De La Marche Vers L'éveil De Shāntideva. Peyzac-le-Moustier, France: Éditions Padmakara.
  • Mrozik, Susanne. 1998. The Relationship Between Morality and the Body in Monastic Training According to the Śikṣāsamuccaya. Harvard University.
  • Mrozik, Susanne. 2007. Virtuous Bodies: The Physical Dimensions of Morality in Buddhist Ethics. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Oldmeadow, P.R. 1994. A Study of the Wisdom Chapter (Prajñāparamitā Pariccheda) of the Bodhicaryāvatārapañjikā of Prajñākaramati. Australian National University.
  • Onishi, Kaoru. 2003. The Bodhicaryāvatāra and Its Monastic Aspects: On the Problem of Representation. University of Michigan.
  • Pettit, John. 1999. Altruism and Reality: Studies in the Philosophy of the Bodhicharyavatara. Journal of Buddhist Ethics 6.
  • Saito, Akira. 1993. A Study of Akṣayamati (=Śāntideva)'s Bodhisattvacaryāvatāra as Found in the Tibetan Manuscripts From Tun-Huang. Faculty of Humanities, Miye University.
  • Saito, Akira. 1996. Śāntideva in the History of Mādhyamika Philosophy. In Buddhism in India and Abroad: An Integrating Influence in Vedic and Post-Vedic Perspective. Ed. Kalpakam Sankarnarayan, Motohiro Yoritomi, and Shubhada A. Joshi. Mumbai: Somaiya Publications Pvt. Ltd.
  • Siderits, Mark. 2000. The Reality of Altruism: Reconstructing Śāntideva. Philosophy East and West 50 (3): 412-24.
  • Siderits, Mark. 2005. Freedom, Caring and Buddhist Philosophy. Contemporary Buddhism 6 (2): 87-113.
  • Sweet, Michael J. 1977. Śāntideva and the Mādhyamika: The Prajñāpāramitā-Pariccheda of the Bodhicaryāvatāra. University of Wisconsin-Madison.
  • Sweet, Michael J. 1996. Mental Purification (Blo Sbyong): A Native Tibetan Genre of Religious Literature. In Tibetan Literature: Studies in Genre. Ed. José Ignacio Cabezón, and Roger R. Jackson. Ithaca, NY: Snow Lion.
  • Thurman, Robert A.F. 2004. Anger: The Seven Deadly Sins. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Williams, Paul. 1998a. Altruism and Reality: Studies in the Philosophy of the Bodhicaryāvatāra. Richmond, UK: Curzon Press.
  • Williams, Paul. 1998b. The Absence of Self and the Removal of Pain: How Śāntideva Destroyed the Bodhisattva Path. In Altruism and Reality: Studies in the Philosophy of the Bodhicaryāvatāra, Richmond, UK: Curzon Press.

e. Related Interest

  • Burton, David. 2004. Buddhism, Knowledge, and Liberation: A Philosophical Analysis of Suffering. Aldershot, England; Burlington, VT: Ashgate.
  • Chang, Garma C.C., ed. 1991. A Treasury of Mahāyāna Sūtras: Selections From the Mahāratnakūṭa Sūtra. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass.
  • Harrison, Paul. 1987. Who Gets to Ride in the Great Vehicle? Self-Image and Identity Among Followers of the Early Mahāyāna. Journal of the International Association of Buddhist Studies 10 (2): 67-89.
  • Hayes, Richard. 1994. The Analysis of Karma in Vasubandhu's Abhidharmakośabhāṣya. In Hermeneutical Paths to the Sacred Worlds of India. Ed. Katherine K. Young, Atlanta: Scholars Press.
  • Heim, Maria. 2004. Theories of the Gift in South Asia: Hindu, Buddhist and Jain Reflections on Dāna. New York and Oxford: Routledge.
  • Hibbets, Maria. 2000. The Ethics of Esteem. Journal of Buddhist Ethics 7 26-42.
  • Kajiyama, Yuichi. 1989. Transfer and Transformation of Merits in Relation to Emptiness. In Studies in Buddhist Philosophy (Selected Papers). Ed. Katsumi Minaki. Kyoto: Rinsen Book Co.
  • Keown, Damien. 2005. Buddhism: Morality Without Ethics? In Buddhist Studies From India to America: Essays in Honor of Charles S. Prebish. Ed. Damien Keown. London: Routledge.
  • Lang, Karen. 2003. Four Illusions: Candrakīrti's Advice to Travelers on the Bodhisattva Path. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. 1966. A Short History of Ethics: A History of Moral Philosophy From the Homeric Age to the Twentieth Century. New York: Touchstone.
  • McClintock, Sara, and Georges Dreyfus, eds. 2002. The Svātantrika-Prāsaṅgika Distinction: What Difference Does a Difference Make? Somerville, MA: Wisdom Publiccations.
  • Nattier, Jan. 2003. A Few Good Men: The Bodhisattva Path According to the Inquiry of Ugra (Ugraparipṛcchā). Honolulu: University of Hawai'i Press.
  • Parfit, Derek. 1984. Reasons and Persons. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Pye, Michael. 1978. Skilful Means: A Concept in Mahayana Buddhism. London: Duckworth.
  • Solomon, Robert C. 2006. The Big Questions: A Short Introduction to Philosophy. Belmont, CA: Thomson Wadsworth.
  • Sprung, Mervyn. 1979. Lucid Exposition of the Middle Way: The Essential Chapters From the Prasannapadā of Candrakīrti. Boulder, CO: Prajñā Press.
  • Tatz, Mark. 1994. The Skill in Means (Upāyakauśalya) Sūtra. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass.
  • Wilson, Liz. 1996. Charming Cadavers: Horrific Figurations of the Feminine in Indian Buddhist Hagiographic Literature. Chicago: University of Chicago Press.

Author Information

Amod Lele
Boston University

Nicholas Rescher (1928—)

RescherNicholas Rescher (1928- ) is a prominent representative of contemporary pragmatism, but, unlike most analytic thinkers, he managed to establish himself as a systematic philosopher. In particular, he built a system of "pragmatic idealism" that combines elements of the European continental idealism with American pragmatism. One of the most salient features of Rescher¹s work is the breadth of topics with which he has dealt, including logic in its various forms, epistemology, the philosophy of science, metaphysics, process philosophy, ethics and political philosophy. He has written about 400 articles and 100 books.

In his system of pragmatic idealism, the activity of the human mind plays a key role and makes a fundamental contribution to knowledge, while "valid" knowledge contributes to practical success. Rescher also defends a coherence theory of truth in a manner differing in a significant way from that endorsed by classical idealism. He draws an original distinction between a pragmatism of the left and a pragmatism of the right. The first is a flexible type of pragmatism that endorses a greatly enhanced cognitive relativism. The second envisions the pragmatist enterprise as a source of cognitive security. Rescher sees Charles S. Peirce, Clarence I. Lewis and himself as adherents to the pragmatism of the right, and William James, F. S. C. Schiller and Richard Rorty as representatives of the pragmatism of the left, with John Dewey standing in a middle of the road position.

In the philosophy of science, Rescher claims, against any form of instrumentalism and many postmodern authors as well, that natural science can validate a plausible commitment to the actual existence of its theoretical entities. Scientific conceptions aim at what really exists in the world, but only hit it imperfectly and "well off the mark." What we can get is, at most, a rough consonance between our scientific ideas and reality itself.

Rescher recognizes that moral rules are frequently part of the customs of a community, but he denies that morality consists in conformity to mores or in benefit-maximization.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Main Topics of Rescher’s Work
  3. Pragmatism
  4. Objectivity and Rationality
  5. Truth
  6. Evolutionary Epistemology
  7. Pragmatic Idealism
  8. Philosophy of Science
  9. Logic and Conceptual Schemes
  10. Social Philosophy
  11. Ethical Issues
  12. References and Further Reading

1. Life

Nicholas Rescher was born on July 15, 1928, in the German town of Hagen, Westphalia. He is one of the many contemporary American philosophers whose life began in a foreign country, and who then pursued a successful career in the United States. Rescher obtained his Ph.D. in Philosophy from Princeton University in 1951 at the age of twenty-two. He was the youngest person ever to do so in that department. He is also among the most prolific of contemporary scholars, having written more than 400 articles and 100 books, ranging over many areas of philosophy, over a dozen of which have been translated into foreign languages.

He was awarded the Alexander von Humboldt Prize for Humanistic Scholarship in 1984, the Cardinal Mercier Prize in 2005, and the American Catholic Philosophical Society’s Aquinas medal in 2007. He has served as a President of the American Philosophical Association, American Catholic Philosophy Association, American G. W. Leibniz Society, C. S. Peirce Society, and the American Metaphysical Society. He has held visiting lectureships at Oxford, Constance, Salamanca, Munich, and Marburg; and his work has been recognized by seven honorary degrees from universities on three continents. Rescher serves on the editorial board of Process Studies, the principal academic journal for both process philosophy and theology. He has for many years been teaching at the University of Pittsburgh with a status of University Professor. His life is detailed in an Autobiography (Frankfurt: Ontos Verlag, 2007).

2. Main Topics of Rescher’s Work

Rescher has written on a wide range of topics, including logic, epistemology, the philosophy of science, metaphysics, and the philosophy of value. He is best known as an advocate of pragmatism and, more recently, of process philosophy. Over the course of his six-decade research career, Rescher has established himself as a systematic philosopher of the old style, and the author of a system of pragmatic idealism that combines elements of continental idealism with American pragmatism. To this end, he:

  • Has developed a system of pragmatic idealism, in which the activity of the human mind makes a positive and constitutive contribution to knowledge, and “valid” knowledge contributes to practical success;
  • Defends a coherence theory of truth in a manner differing somewhat from that of classical idealism; see for example his exchange in The Philosophy of Brand Blanshard (in the Library of Living Philosophers series);
  • Advocates an “erotetic propagation” of science, asserting that scientific inquiry will continue without end because each newly answered question adds a presupposition for at least one more open question to the current body of scientific knowledge;
  • Propounds an epistemic law of diminishing returns that holds that actual knowledge merely stands as the logarithm of the available information. This has the corollary that the comparative growth of knowledge is inversely proportional to the volume of information already at hand, so that when information grows exponentially, knowledge will grow at a merely linear rate.

Apart from this larger program, Rescher has made significant contributions to:

  • Historical studies on Leibniz, Kant, Peirce, and on the medieval Arabic theory of modal syllogistic and logic;
  • Logic (the conception of autodescriptive systems of many-sided logic);
  • The theory of knowledge (“epistemetrics” as a quantitative approach in theoretical epistemology);
  • The philosophy of science (the theory of logarithmic returns in scientific effort).

3. Pragmatism

Rescher draws an important distinction between a more flexible “pragmatism of the left” and a more conservative “pragmatism of the right.” Referring to a famous article by Arthur Lovejoy, he notes that there seem to be as many pragmatisms as pragmatists. Usually, however, those who are interested in pragmatism from an historical point of view tend to forget that, from the beginning, a substantial polarity is present in this tradition of thought. It is a dichotomy between what Rescher calls “pragmatism of the left,” namely a flexible type of pragmatism which endorses a greatly enhanced cognitive relativism, and a “pragmatism of the right,” namely a different position that sees the pragmatist stance as a source of cognitive security. Both positions are eager to assure pluralism in the cognitive enterprise and in the concrete conduct of human affairs, but the meaning they attribute to the term “pluralism” is not the same. Rescher sees C. S. Peirce, C. I. Lewis and himself as adherents of the pragmatism of the right, and William James, F. S. C. Schiller and Richard Rorty as representatives of the pragmatism of the left, with John Dewey standing somehow in a middle of the road position.

The position of the so-called pragmatists of the left is clear: one just has to read Rorty’s works to see where it ends up, from both a cognitive and a social-political viewpoint. But what does the pragmatism of the right really come to? Parochial diversity is something that a post-modern pragmatist such as Rorty gladly accepts in order to achieve results that are, at the same time, subjectivistic and relativistic. On the other hand, even a Rescherian pragmatist sees practical efficacy as the cornerstone of our endeavors, but at the same time he takes efficacy to be the best instrument we have at our disposal for achieving objectification.

Objective pragmatism -- or the pragmatism of the right, as Rescher calls it -- implies that (a) our social-linguistic world evolved out of natural reality; (b) this social-linguistic world acquires an increasing autonomy; (c) between the social and the natural worlds there is no ontological line of separation, but just a functional one; (d) however, the accessibility to natural reality is only granted by the tools that the social-linguistic world provides us with; (e) this means that our knowledge of natural reality is always tentative and mediated by our conceptual capacities; (f) there is no need to draw relativistic conclusions from this situation, because the presence of an objective reality that underlies the data at hand puts upon personal desires objective constraints that we are able to overcome at the verbal level, but not in the sphere of rational deliberations implementing actions.

4. Objectivity and Rationality

Rescher’s definition of ontological objectivity is the following: Objectivity is not something we infer from the data; it is something we do and must presuppose. It is something that we postulate or presume from the very outset of our dealings with people’s claims about the world’s facts - our own included. Its epistemic status is not that of an empirical discovery but that of a presupposition whose ultimate justification is a transcendental argument from the very possibility of the projects of communication and inquiry as we standardly conduct them.

The specification at stake here is just the opposite of objectivity conceived of as something that we merely infer from empirical data (maybe with a little abstractive effort). But, on the other side, nor can it be equated with a classical idealistic viewpoint, according to which objectivity is something that our mind simply creates in the process of reflection. Objectivity is, in this case, a sort of cross-product of the encounter between our mind-shaped tools and capacities, and a surrounding reality made of things that are real in the classical meaning of the term: they are there and in no way can be said to be mind-created. But a final -- and quite important -- qualification is in order: the very mode in which we see these real things, and conceive of (and speak about) them is indeed mind-dependent. Science itself gives us some crucial insights in this direction, since it shows that we see, say, tables and trees in a certain way which, however, does not match the image that scientific instruments are able to attain.

On the other hand rationality is for Rescher a matter of idealization. Although we must admit our natural origins and evolutionary heritage, we must give way as well to the recognition that there is indeed something that makes us unique. Only human beings are able to “gaze towards idealities” and to somehow detach themselves from “the actualities on an imperfect world.” Just like objectivity, rationality is the expression of mankind’s capacity to see not only how things actually are, but also how they might have been and how they could turn out to be if we were to take some course of action rather than another. Thus the concept of possibility plays a key role.

5. Truth

Rescher endorses a coherentist approach to truth. Why? The answer is, first of all, systemic and holistic: he needs a coherence theory because the older and more classical correspondence theories do not fit into the comprehensive philosophical system he managed to build. But there is also a more theoretical reply, because he believes a coherence theory has a great number of fertile applications, such as in the methodology of the use of historical sources, the analysis of counterfactual conditionals, and the problems of inductive logic. As he recognizes in The Coherence Theory of Truth, the first impetus towards developing a coherentist approach to truth came from a theory of inference from inconsistent premises constructed for the analysis of counterfactual conditionals.

Rescher’s point of departure is the distinction between “definitional” and “criterial” theories of truth, that is, between what truth is and how we acquire truth. The definitional theories try to provide a definition of the expression “is true” as a characteristic of propositions. The criterial ones aim, instead, at specifying the test-conditions which allow us to determine whether (or not) there is warrant to apply “is true” to propositions. Rescher prefers the second alternative and, once again, the reasons for such a preference are typically pragmatic: The criterial approach to truth is decision-oriented. Its aim is not to specify in the abstract what “is true” means, but rather to put us into a position to implement and apply the concept by instructing us as to the circumstances under which there is rational warrant to characterize or class something (that is, some proposition) as true. Why bother with a criterion once a definition is at hand? To know the meaning of a word or concept is only half the battle: We want to be able to apply it, too. It does little good to know how terms like “speed limit” or “misdemeanor” are defined in the abstract if we are left in the dark as to the conditions of their application.

6. Evolutionary Epistemology

According to Rescher we must address a basic question: which kind of evolution are we referring to when talking of evolutionary epistemology? If we take evolution to be an undifferentiated concept, such that no useful distinction can be found in it, we are -- according to our author -- on a wrong track. The evolutionary “pattern” is certainly one, but for sure this should not lead us to assume that the specific characteristics of mankind must be left out of the picture, either because they are not important or because no specifically human characteristic is admitted. Rescher’s evolutionary framework, as it always happens in his philosophical system, is pluralistic and multi-sided.

The evolutionary pathway provided by the route of intelligence is one of the alternative ways of coping within nature that are available to biological organisms. (Other ways include toughness, multiplicity and isolation). Human beings, thus, can be said to have evolved to fill a possible ecological niche left free for intelligent creatures.

There are, however, many ways to look at the evolution of mankind. Rescher stresses that, after all, intelligence has evolved not because it aids the survival of its possessors within nature. It arose because it represents one effective means of survival. Intelligence is our functional substitute for the numerousness of termites, the ferocity of lions, or the toughness of microorganisms. So, it might even be said that this is our specific manner of fighting the battle for survival: we would not be here if our intelligence-led rationality were not survival-conducive. But does all this mean that intelligence is an inevitable feature of conscious organic life? The answer to such a question is crucial and, as long as Rescher is concerned, is negative.

The scheme we get by adopting this stance is, thus, more complex than the reductionistic one endorsed by materialist philosophers, since any element of the biological sphere is matched by an analogous element located in a sphere that may be defined as “sociological-intellectual,” along the following lines. At the biological level we have:

(A) Biological mutation;

(B) Reproductive elimination of traits through their non-realization in an individual’s progeny; and, eventually,

(C) One’s physical progeny.

The same steps can be traced at the sociological-intellectual level:

(A1) Procedural variation;

(B1) Reproductive elimination of processes through their lapsed transmissions to one’s successors (for example, children or students);

(C1) Those individuals whom one influences.

The differences between (A)-(C) and (A1)-(C1) are clearly visible but, no doubt, the same process is at issue in both cases, since both involve structures that are maintained over time.

7. Pragmatic Idealism

No one can seriously doubt that there are strong idealistic features in Rescher’s philosophy. For example, he never tires of stressing that the conceptual apparatus we employ itself makes a creative contribution to our view of the world, and his holistic stance is clearly influenced by Hegel and Bradley, thinkers who have long been quite unpopular within American analytic philosophy. But idealism is just one element in a broader framework where pragmatism plays the key role, and other important components are detectable as well in his thought (for instance naturalism). No doubt Leibniz, Kant, Hegel and Bradley are all philosophers who deeply influenced his outlook. But, still, the central figure in Rescher’s personal Olympus is (and will remain) Charles S. Peirce. Here is how Rescher recalls how the idealistic perspective became a central feature of his comprehensive philosophical outlook:

I recall well how the key ideas of my idealistic theory of natural laws - of “lawfulness as imputation” - came to me in 1968 during work on this project while awaiting the delivery of Arabic manuscripts in the Oriental Reading Room of the British Museum. It struck me that what a law states is a mere generalization, but what marks this generalization as something special in our sight -- and renders it something we see as a genuine law of nature -- is the role that we assign to it in inference. Lawfulness is thus not a matter of what the law-statement says, but how it is used in the systematization of knowledge -- the sort of role we impute to it. These ideas provided an impetus to idealist lines of thought and marked the onset of my commitment to a philosophical idealism which teaches that the mind is itself involved in the conceptual constitution of the objects of our knowledge. (Instructive Journey: An Essay in Autobiography, pages 172-173)

It should be noted that Rescher immediately tied these idealistic insights to the philosophy of science, a sector that has always been at the core of his interests. The aforementioned statements, in fact, led him to the conclusion that scientific discovery, Galileo notwithstanding, is not a matter of simply “reading” what is written in the book of nature, but is rather the outcome of the interaction between nature on the one side, and human mind on the other. The contribution which mind gives to the construction of “our science” is at least as important as that provided by nature: no science as we know it would be possible without the specific contribution of the mind.

What is the source of our ideas according to his philosophical outlook? Locke, for instance, remarked that we can only think about ideas, their source being either sensation or observation of the internal operations of our mind. Taking this path we can certainly avoid the problems connected to metaphysical skepticism, but ideas become our only “real” point of reference, which is not such a wonderful solution from an empiricist point of view. According to the verifiability principle held by the logical positivists, on the other hand, the meaningfulness of a statement is strictly tied to the existence of some possible set of observations that, were they to be ever made, would determine the truth of the statement itself. In this case metaphysical skepticism could be avoided by equating metaphysics with non-sense, but the verifiability principle created other, unexpected problems. Scientific laws, in fact, clearly resist the application of the verifiability principle, and the price to be paid for the elimination of metaphysics seemed, to say the least, too high. So the problem of demarcating science from metaphysics, which has been deemed tremendously important by some sectors of early twentieth century philosophy, remains pressing.

Detaching himself from the mainstream of American analytic philosophy which, under the influence of the logical positivists, had been largely dominated by empiricist and positivist trends of thought, Rescher in the early 1970’s launched his project of rehabilitating idealism. Taking notice of the fact that idealism had been effectively dead in Anglo-American philosophy for more than a generation, he tells us that, “this eclipse of an important sector of philosophical tradition seems to be entirely unjustified on the merits.”

“Idealism” is a sort of umbrella-term that covers a large variety of trends and sub-trends. Each of them is somehow connected to the others, but disagreements within the idealistic field have always been strong. Rescher readily recognizes this fact, providing a general scheme in which all the various idealistic trends can be inserted. The fundamental distinction to be made is between the “ontological” versions of idealism and the “epistemic” ones. Ontological versions imply that everything there is arises causally from, or is supervenient upon, the operations of mind. Epistemic versions are less strongly committed because they rule out the thesis that mind creates the world in toto, be it natural or social, and content themselves to point out the intimate correlatedness between our mind and the world-as-we-know it. Rescher says explicitly that his conceptual idealism belongs to the epistemic version of the theory, and he characterizes it as follows: “Conceptual idealism [states that] any fully adequate descriptive characterization of the nature of the physical (‘material’) reality must make reference to mental operations; some recourse to verbal characteristics or operations is required within the substantive content of an adequate account of what it is to be real.”

Another important consideration relates to Rescher’s attitude towards Kant and his transcendental idealism. Kant’s presence is clearly perceivable in our author’s writings, but his Kant is always Kant viewed and interpreted through the lenses of pragmatism (which in this case are Peircean lenses). On the one hand Rescher accepts the Kantian view that our knowledge is strongly determined by the a priori elements present in our conceptual schemes, and that they indeed have an essential function as long as our interpretation of reality is concerned. On the other hand, he tends to see these aprioristic elements as resting on a contingent basis, and validated on pragmatic rather than necessitarian considerations. The mind certainly makes a great contribution towards shaping reality-as-we-see-it, but the very presence of the mind itself can be explained by adopting an evolutionary point of view.

8. Philosophy of Science

It is only too natural that when the man of the street reads about the results of scientific discoveries he takes them to be descriptions of “real” nature. Why should different thoughts come to his mind, given the impressive results that science was able to attain in the last few centuries? It should be noted, however, that not only philosophers, but also even many scientists have often denied the validity of the picture that the man of the street takes more or less for granted. Many examples could be provided in this regard, as any standard text on the history of science might easily confirm. In the past century uncertainty about the content of our theories has grown fast, together with the feeling that there are alternative theories that can account equally well for all possible observations. Clearly the threat of relativism arises at this point, even though many authors nowadays no longer take relativism to be a threat, but just a fact of the matter.

Obviously things were different when logical positivism still was the dominant -- and, in many cases, even the only -- doctrine in philosophy of science. In that case the main purpose was to individuate the immutable models that lie beyond concrete scientific practice, because it was commonly held by the main representatives of this neopositivism that science is objective and progressive, in the cumulative sense of the term. Intersubjectivity was granted through recourse to the scientific language, purportedly believed to be neutral, free of errors and misunderstandings and, thus, available to every observer. Formal logic became then something much more important than a simple instrument, since its task was supposed to be that of “capturing” intersubjectivity by means of a language constructed in the purest form possibly available to human beings, leaving aside all the unpleasant distortions that our natural languages bring with them.

At this point we can note that scientific realism (and the nature of scientific knowledge at large) is a theme where the originality of Rescher’s position clearly emerges. Certainly he is very distant from the received view of logical empiricism. Looking back to the years of his philosophical formation, he says: I was thus led back to take a rather different view of the technical preoccupations in the minutiae of formal analysis which came to the forefront in the postwar years. It seemed to me that the passion for the detailed analysis of small-scale side issues was getting out of hand. All too often, philosophers were using their technical tools on those issues of detail congenial to their application, rather than concentrating them on inherently important matters. Technical questions became preoccupations in their own right, rather than because of any significant bearing on the central problems of the field.

Rescher’s increasing distance from the neopositivist model, however, should not lead one to think that he got closer to the more recent, and more fashionable, post-empiricist trend of thought. He argues, against any form of instrumentalism and many postmodern authors as well, that natural science can indeed validate a plausible commitment to the actual existence of its theoretical entities. Scientific conceptions aim at what really exists in the world, but only hit it imperfectly and “well off the mark.” What we can get is, at most, a rough consonance between our scientific ideas and reality itself. This statement should not sound surprising, if only one recalls Rescher’s proclaimed conceptual idealism and his unwillingness to trace a precise borderline between ontology and epistemology.

Furthermore, Rescher’s aim is to replace Charles S. Peirce’s “long-run convergence” theory of scientific progress by a more modest position geared to increasing success in scientific applications, especially in matters of prediction and control. This dimension of applicative efficacy is something real, and can hardly be denied from a rational point of view. He goes on arguing that the connection between adequacy and applicative success in questions of scientific theorizing leads, in turn, to a pragmatist-flavored philosophy of science. He also states very clearly that “perfection” (the completion of the project) is, in principle, unfeasible. This means that his ideas are opposed to all those scientific projects whose aim is the search for a “final” theory.

So we have a general picture of this kind: In attempting answers to our questions about how things stand in the world, science offers (or at any rate, both endeavors and purports to offer) information about the world. The extent to which science succeeds in this mission is, of course, disputable. The theory of sub-atomic matter is unquestionably a “mere theory,” but it could not help us to explain those all too real atomic explosions if it is not a theory about real substances. Only real objects can produce real effects. There exist no “hypothetical” or “theoretical entities” at all, only entities, plus hypotheses and theories about them which may be right or wrong, well-founded or ill-founded. The theoretical entities of science are introduced not for their own interest but for a utilitarian mission, to furnish the materials of causal explanation for the real comportment of real things. Thus our inability to claim that natural science as we understand it depicts reality correctly must not be taken to mean that science is a merely practical device, a mere instrument for prediction and control that has no bearing on describing “the nature of things.” What science says is descriptively committal in making claims regarding “the real world,” but the tone of voice in which it proffers these claims always is (or should be) provisional and tentative.

So we can never assume that a particular scientific theory, for instance, Einstein’s relativity theory, gives us the true picture of reality, since we know perfectly well from the history of science that, in a future we cannot actually foresee, it will be replaced by a better theory. And it should be noted, moreover, that this future theory will be better for future scientists, but not the best in absolute terms, since its final destiny is to be displaced by yet another theory.

Rescher’s conception of scientific realism is thus strictly tied to his distinction between reality-as-such and reality-as-we-think-of-it. He argues that there is indeed little justification for believing that our present-day natural science describes the world as it really is, and this fact does not allow us to endorse an absolute and unconditioned scientific realism. In other words, if we claim that the theoretical entities of current science correctly pick up the “furniture of the world,” we run into the inevitable risk of hypostatizing something, that is, our present science, that is only a historically contingent product of humankind, valid in this particular period of its cultural evolution. Rescher’s view is, instead, that “a realistic awareness of scientific fallibilism precludes the claim that the furnishings of the real world are exactly as our science states them to be -- that electrons “actually are just what the latest Handbook of Physics claims them to be.”

But what about future science? We might in fact be tempted to say that, since present-day science is really bound to be imperfect and incomplete, perhaps future science will do the job, thus accomplishing that project of “perfected science” that the logical positivists loved so much. Even in this case, however, many problems arise. First of all, just which future are we talking about? There is indeed no reason to believe that tomorrow’s science will be very different from ours as long as its capacity of providing the “correct” picture of reality is concerned. The fact is, he argues, that scientific theories always have a finite lifespan. This is so for every human creation (and science is a human product, in any possible sense of the term), so that, “as something that comes into being within time, the passage of time will also bear it away.” While we can certainly claim that the aims of science are stable, it should honestly be recognized that its questions and answers are not.

Ideal science, even when its realization is referred to the future, looks more like a philosophical utopia than a feasible accomplishment (even though utopias, as Rescher often recognizes, are indeed useful when they are viewed as essentially “regulative” ideas). Perfected science, thus, is not “what will emerge when,” but “what would emerge if,” and many realistically unachievable conditions must be provided in order to obtain such a highly desirable result. This means that our cognitive enterprise must be pursued in an imperfect world, and the strong realistic thesis that science faithfully describes the real world should be taken for what it is: a matter of intent. The only type of scientific realism that looks reasonable to Rescher is a scientific realism viewed in idealistic perspective, in which what is at stake is a sort of “ideal science” that no wise men can claim to possess.

9. Logic and Conceptual Schemes

The real alternative at stake here is the following: logic as “doctrine” vs. logic as “instrument.” Rescher does not deny that logic has, in this particular regard, a dual nature. From the doctrinal point of view it is clearly a body of theses or, even better, a systematic codification of those special propositions defined as “logical truths.” At the methodological level, instead, it must be seen as an operational code for conducting sound reasoning. Having once again recourse to historical considerations, our author observes that the distinction at issue carries back to the old dispute -- carried on throughout late antiquity and the Middle Ages -- as to whether logic is to be considered as a part of knowledge or as an instrument for its development. The best minds of the day insisted that the proper answer is simply that logic is both of these -- at once a theory with a body of theses of its own, and a tool for testing arguments to determine whether they are good or bad.

A pragmatic conception of logic, however, leads him to view its instrumental-methodological character as primary with respect to the doctrinal features. All this follows quite naturally from what we said above, because, for a pragmatically oriented thinker, logic’s task lies, first of all, in systematizing and rationalizing the practice of reasoning in all the contexts (theoretical included) where human beings usually draw inferences. Logical rules, in turn, are not supposed to have an abstract and formalistic character, because in that case they cannot be attuned to human practices (be they theoretical or instrumental). It is interesting to note that this approach is not distant from some insights contained in the works of the second Wittgenstein, where language is no longer taken to be an ideal entity endowed with some sort of “essence,” but rather a set of social practices that are used in order to satisfy men’s concrete needs. Our models of inference thus become the products of social practices, while the social dimension pertains to language in each of its many characteristics and features. In other words, our rules for drawing inferences are essentially practical and not formal; they are rules that allow (or do not allow) us to perform a certain kind of action.

For Rescher a conceptual scheme for operation in the factual domain is always correlative with a Weltanschauung -- a view of how things work in the world. And the issue of historical development becomes involved at this juncture, seeing that such a fact-committal scheme is clearly a product of temporal evolution. Our conceptions of things are a moving rather than a fixed target for analysis. The startling conclusion is that there are assertions in a conceptual scheme A that are simply not available in another conceptual scheme B, because no equivalent in it may be found. This view also allows him to challenge Donald Davidson when he says that, “we get a new out of an old scheme when the speakers of a language come to accept as true an important range of sentences they previously took to be false.” The point at stake, in fact, is different, since Rescher answers that a change of scheme is not just a matter of saying things differently, but rather of saying altogether different things.

In other words, a scheme A may be committed to phenomena that another scheme B cannot even envisage: Galenic physicians, for instance, had absolutely nothing to say about bacteria and viruses because those entities lay totally beyond their conceptual dimension. Where one scheme is eloquent, Rescher says, the other is altogether silent. This means, moreover, that our classical and bivalent logic of the True and False is not much help in such a context. Some assertions that are deemed to be true in a certain scheme may have no value whatsoever in another scheme, so that we need to formalize this truth-indeterminacy by having recourse, say, to a many-valued logical system in which, besides the classical T and F, a third (Indeterminate) value I is present. We have, in sum, a more complex picture than Davidson’s. Rescher observes that in brushing aside the idea of different conceptual schemes we incur the risk of an impoverishment in our problem-horizons. So, to deny that different conceptual schemes exist is absurd.

10. Social Philosophy

Even in the social field, for Rescher, context-relativization means neither irrationalism nor indifferentism. For sure we must recognize the presence of different perspectives, but on the other hand our experiential indications provide us with criteria for making a rational choice. The fact that no appropriate universal diet exists does not lead to the conclusion that we can eat anything, and the absence of a globally correct language does not mean that we can choose a language at random for communicating with others in a particular context. For these reasons he concludes that an individual need not be intimidated by the fact of disagreement -- it makes perfectly good sense for people to do their rational best towards securing evidentiated beliefs and justifiable choices without undue worry about whether or not others disagree.

To what extent are Rescher’s doubts about the notion of consensus applicable to the real social and political situations? Consensus is deemed by many authors to be a sine qua non condition for achieving a benign political and social order, while its absence is often viewed as a premonitory symptom of chaos. Needless to say the feelings are usually strong in this regard, because political and social philosophy has a more direct impact on our daily life than other such traditional sectors of the philosophical inquiry as, say, metaphysics or epistemology.

What deserves to be pointed out is that the search for consensus has many concrete contraindications, which can mainly be drawn from history. Think, for instance, of how Hitler gained power in Germany in the 1930’s. As a matter of fact he obtained a resounding victory through democratic election, because he was able to make the political platform of the Nazi party consensually accepted by a large majority of citizens. It would be foolish, however, to draw the conclusion that Hitler and the Nazis were right just because they were good consensus-builders. On the contrary, the United States is a good example of a democratically thriving society that can dispense with consensus, and where dissensus is deemed to be productive (at least to a certain extent). Another striking fact is that the former Soviet Union was, instead, a typically consensus-seeking society.

Homogeneity granted by consensus is not the mark of a benign social order, since this role is more likely to be played by a dissensus-dominated situation that is in turn able to accommodate diversity of opinions. It follows, among other things, that we should be very careful not to characterize the consensus endorsed by majority opinion as intrinsically rational. In the industrialized nations of the Western world the power of the media in building up consensus is notoriously great. It may, and does, happen sometimes, however, that the power of the media in assuring consensus is used to support bad politicians, who repay the favor by paying attention to sectorial rather than to general interests. It is thus easily seen that consensus is not an objective that deserves to be pursued no matter what.

All this seems plausible and reasonable to Rescher, despite the fact that many theorists nowadays continue to view consensus as an indispensable component of a good and stable social order. It is the case, for example, with Jürgen Habermas. The Marxist roots of Habermas’ thought explain why the German philosopher is so eager to have the activities of the people harmonized thanks to their interpersonal agreement about ends and means. The basis of agreement is thus both collective and abstractly universal. Another Rescher’s key word, “acquiescence,” needs at this point be introduced. Given that the insistence on the pre-requisite of communal consensus is simply unrealistic, we must come to terms with concrete situations, that is, with facts as presented by real life. If, according to contractarian lines of thought, we take justice to be the establishment of arrangements that are (or, even better, would be) reached in idealized conditions, then we cannot help but note that justice is not a feature of our imperfect world. “Life is unjust” is bound to be our natural conclusion, together with the acknowledgement that real-life politics is the art of the possible. It is obvious as well, however, that even in real-life politics we constantly need to make decisions and to take some course of action. How should we behave, then, given the fact that the so-called communal consensus turned out to be unachievable?

The answer is that a modern and democratic society looks for social accommodation, which means that it always tries to devise methods for letting its members live together in peace even in those inevitable cases when a subgroup prevails over another. As Rescher as it, the choice is not just between either the agreement of the whole group, on the one hand, or the lordship of some particular subgroup, on the other hand. Accommodation through general acquiescence is a perfectly practicable mode for making decisions in the public order and resolving its conflicts. And, given the realities of the situation in a complex and diversified society, it has significant theoretical and practical advantages over its more radical alternatives. The reader will not find it difficult to recognize that this is just the strategy constantly adopted within the democratic societies of the Western world, which, in turn, distinguishes them from all forms of tyrannies and monocratic (one-person) forms of government.

Acquiescence is thus a matter of mutual restraint, a sort of “live and let live” concrete politics that permits any individual or subgroup belonging in a larger group to avoid fight in order to gain respect for its own position. Thus acquiescence, and not consensual agreement, turns out to be the key factor for building a really democratic society, Rescher argues. In a situation like that of the former Yugoslavia, for instance, it would be foolish to ask for consensus given the historical and ethnical roots of war today. But a search for acquiescence would be much less foolish, with all factions giving up something in order to avoid even greater damages and losses.

If we want to be pluralists in the true spirit of Western democratic thought, we must abandon the quest for a monolithic and rational order, together with the purpose of maximizing the number of people who approve what the government, say, does. On the contrary, we should have in mind an acquiescence-seeking society where the goal is that of minimizing the number of people who strongly disapprove of what is being done. We should never forget, Rescher claims, that the idea that “all should think alike” is both dangerous and anti-democratic, as history shows with plenty of pertinent examples. Since consensus is an absolute unlikely to be achieved in concrete life, a difference must be drawn between “being desirable” and “being essential.” All in all, it can be said that it qualifies at most for the former status. The general conclusion is that consensus is no more than one positive factor that has to be weighed on the scale along with many others.

11. Ethical Issues

Rescher recognizes that cultural, social and ethical diversity are a fact of life rather than a mere hypothesis. Social scientists have always stressed the elements of differentiation across social groups, and especially sociologists are ready to pick up strong differences as long as moral beliefs of various social groups are concerned. From this, most social scientists and even several philosophers draw the conclusion that cultural relativism is unavoidable: since each group has a different way of dealing with beliefs, relationships, and so forth, it follows that there is no unique criterion for evaluating actions. Or, to put it in a slightly different way, we are provided with no “trans-cultural standard” which can be deemed to be valid for all conceptual schemes. Social scientists and philosophers who find the hermeneutic stance congenial will most likely be in favor of the aforementioned conclusion, because it shows that cultures are unique and cannot be investigated from a general viewpoint.

It goes without saying that the ethical side of relativism is strictly connected to all its other branches (conceptual, epistemological, etc.), since the real problem at stake here is the search for cross-cultural “universals” which could explain the fact, often denied by relativists, that we share as rational beings many common features (which, of course, does not mean to deny that there are many and important differences, too).

So we must wonder about the real nature of norms and values: are they something that can be only referred to particular social groups, in the sense that we can only speak of norms and values as referred to group A, or B, or C? Or are we authorized to talk about kinds of “moral universals” that are the true foundations of any normative system?

It would seem that anthropology, and social science in general, has a message for us concerning human variability, but it is not exactly the one endorsed by radical cultural relativism. Rather, the correct conclusion appears to be that there is both uniformity and diversity across human cultures at the level of concepts, beliefs, and norms, sasys Rescher. Diversity shows the creativeness of human capacity for developing cultural instruments. Uniformity, instead, reflects both the biological constants in human life and the common features of the human existential situation.

Relativists of all sorts try to solve the problem by equating “morality” on the one side and “mores” on the other. Rescher notes in this regard that cultural relativism is the doctrine that societies and cultures have their own customs and folkways, which are so many different and in principle equally valid ways of transacting their business of everyday life. Moral relativism is the theory which holds, analogously, that there are different and discordant but in principle equally valid moralities. It is one of the widely pervasive convictions of our day that the former, plausible mode of relativism somehow entails the latter, that one group’s moral goodness is another’s moral wickedness -- it all simply “lies in the eyes of the beholder”.

Rescher goes on noting that social scientists are especially drawn to this sort of approach, which in his opinion amounts to “imperialistic power grabbing.” Thus anthropologists, who study norms and customs, claim that morality belongs to their discipline because moral rules are nothing more than norms and customs. The same happens with the economists, who study the operations of rational self-interest in the production and distribution of goods; they, too, claim that morality belongs to their discipline, because moral rules are no more than procedures that maximize social utility and serve “the greatest good of the greatest number.” Rescher disagrees.

There is in his view a “wide gulf” that separates morality from mere mores. Many social theorists endorsedrelativism from a variety of anthropological, sociological, and ideological perspectives. Relativism has become so successful that it is often seen as a sort of truism that does not even need a defense. For Rescher, however, the rejection of relativism and the articulation of plausible arguments for absolutism are indeed essential to any meaningful legitimation of the moral project. They represent his main task, meaning that the moral project must itself be legitimated “in terms of morality-external values,” that is, values which, like personhood and responsibility for self-realization, are fully in agreement with moral concerns. Instead, values as social conformity or personal advantage are not consonant with such concerns.

Rescher’s strategy is twofold. On the one side he is ready to admit that moral rules are frequently part of the customs of a community or that moral behavior advances the welfare interests of the social group or the individual agent. On the other, however, he firmly rejects the view according to which morality consists in conformity to mores or in benefit-maximization. In other words, morality cannot adequately be accounted for in terms of values that imply no characteristically moral bearing. For this reason Rescher claims that the anthropological route to moral relativism is highly problematic. There is no difficulty whatever about the idea of different social customs, but the idea of different moralities faces insuperable difficulties. The case is much like that of saying that the tribe whose counting practices is based on the sequence: “one, two, many” has a different arithmetic from ourselves. To do anything like justice to the facts one would have to say that they do not have arithmetic at all, but just a peculiar, and very rudimentary way of counting. And similarly with those exotic tribesmen. On the given evidence, they do not have a different morality, but rather their culture has not developed to a point where they have a morality at all. If they think that it is acceptable to engage in practices like the sacrifice of firstborn girl children, then their grasp on the conception of morality is, on the face of it, somewhere between inadequate and nonexistent.

The conclusion is thus clear. Anti-absolutism must take a flexible and non-dogmatic stance if it wants to be coherent enough, while what it does today often is the opposite. The global rejection of absolutes has gone too far, and a middle of the road position is indeed mandatory. As Rescher notes, the very antipathy to dogmatic uniformity that characterizes the era’s sensibilities will, or should, militate against an absolutistic position in relation to philosophical absolutes. There is good reason to see the anti-absolutism of 20th century thought as misguided and in need of replacement by a position that is far less doctrinaire.

12. References and Further Reading

Rescher has published more than 100 books as well as more than 400 essays, chapters, and reviews. Below is a list of selected books:

  • The Development of Arabic Logic. Pittsburgh: University of Pittsburgh Press, 1964.
  • Studies in Arabic Philosophy. Pittsburgh: University of Pittsburgh Press, 1968.
  • Introduction to Value Theory. Englewood Cliffs, NJ: Prentice Hall, 1969.
  • The Coherence Theory of Truth. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1973.
  • Methodological Pragmatism: A Systems-Theoretic Approach to the Theory of Knowledge. Oxford: Basil Blackwell, 1977.
  • Scientific Progress: A Philosophical Essay on the Economics of Research in Natural Science. Pittsburgh: University of Pittsburgh Press, 1978.
  • Risk: A Philosophical Introduction to the Theory of Risk Evaluation and Management. Lanham, MD: University Press of America, 1983.
  • The Strife of Systems: An Essay on the Grounds and Implications of Philosophical Diversity. Pittsburgh: University of Pittsburgh Press, 1985.
  • Rationality. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1988.
  • Cognitive Economy: Economic Perspectives in the Theory of Knowledge. Pittsburgh: University of Pittsburgh Press, 1989.
  • A Useful Inheritance: Evolutionary Epistemology in Philosophical Perspective. Lanham, MD: Rowman & Littlefield, 1989.
  • Human Interests: Reflections on Philosophical Anthropology. Palo Alto: Stanford University Press, 1990.
  • A System of Pragmatic Idealism (three volumes): Volume I: Human Knowledge in Idealistic Perspective. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1991. Volume II: The Validity of Values: Human Values in Pragmatic Perspective. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1992. Volume III: Metaphilosophical Inquiries. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1994.
  • Pluralism: Against the Demand for Consensus. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1993.
  • Luck. New York: Farrar, Straus & Giroux, 1995.
  • Essays in the History of Philosophy. Aldershot, UK: Avebury, 1995.
  • Process Metaphysics. Albany, NY: SUNY Press, 1995.
  • Instructive Journey: An Autobiographical Essay. Lanham, MD: University Press of America, 1996.
  • Complexity: A Philosophical Overview. New Brunswick, NJ: Transaction Publishers, 1998.
  • Predicting The Future: An Introduction To The Theory Of Forecasting. Albany, NY: SUNY Press, 1998.
  • Kant and the Reach of Reason. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1999.
  • Realistic Pragmatism: An Introduction to Pragmatic Philosophy. Albany, NY: SUNY Press, 1999.
  • The Limits of Science, 2nd ed. Pittsburgh: University of Pittsburgh Press, 1999.
  • Nature and Understanding: A Study of the Metaphysics of Science. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2000.
  • Paradoxes: Their Roots, Range, and Resolution. Chicago: Open Court Publishing, 2001.
  • Process Philosophy Nature and Understanding: A Study of the Metaphysics of Science: A Survey of Basic Issues. Pittsburgh: University of Pittsburgh Press, 2001.
  • Epistemology: On the Scope and Limits of Knowledge. Albany, NY: SUNY Press, 2003.
  • On Leibniz. Pittsburgh: University of Pittsburgh Press, 2003.
  • Epistemic Logic. Pittsburgh: University of Pittsburgh Press, 2004.
  • Metaphysics: The Key Issues from a Realist Perspective. Amherst, NY: Prometheus Books, 2005.
  • Reason and Reality: Realism and Idealism in Pragmatic Perspective. Lanham, MD: Rowman & Littlefield, 2005.
  • Collected Papers (14 volumes). Frankfurt: Ontos Verlag, 2005-2006.
  • Epistemetrics. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2006.
  • Conditionals. Cambridge: MIT Press, 2006.
  • Error: On Our Predicament When Things Go Wrong. Pittsburgh: University of Pittsburgh Press, 2007.

Author Information

Michele Marsonet
University of Genoa

Benedict de Spinoza: Metaphysics

spinozaBaruch (or, in Latin, Benedict) de Spinoza (1632-1677) was one of the most important rationalist philosophers in the early modern period, along with Descartes, Leibniz, and Malebranche.  Spinoza is also the most influential “atheist” in Europe during this period.  “Atheist” at the time meant someone who rejects the traditional Biblical views concerning God and his relation to nature.  In his most important book, titled Ethics Demonstrated in a Geometrical Manner, Spinoza argues for a radically new picture of the universe to rival the traditional Judeo-Christian one.  Using a geometrical method similar to Euclid’s Elements and later Newton’s Principia, he argues that there is no transcendent and personal God, no immortal soul, no free will, and that the universe exists without any ultimate purpose or goal.  Instead, Spinoza argues the whole of the natural world, including human beings, follows one and the same set of natural laws (so, humans are not special), that everything that happens could not have happened differently, that the universe is one inherently active totality (which can be conceived of as either “God” or “Nature”), and that the mind and the body are one and the same thing conceived in two ways.

Spinoza’s Ethics appeared provocative  to his contemporaries.  First, many of them found his arguments clear and compelling.  Spinoza begins Ethics by defining key terms and identifying his assumptions.  Most of these would have seemed commonplace to Spinoza’s contemporaries.  He then derives theorems, which he calls “propositions,”  on the basis of this foundation.  Many of the philosophers and theologians who first read Spinoza’s Ethicsn found these definitions and assumptions unproblematic, but were horrified by the theorems which Spinoza proved on the basis of them.  Second, by all accounts Spinoza was an especially good man who lived a modest and virtuous life. The mere possibility of a “virtuous atheist,” however, severed one of the most popular arguments in favor of traditional Biblical religion: that without it, living a moral life was impossible.

This article examines some fundamental issues of Spinoza’s new “atheistic” metaphysics, and it focuses on three of the most important and difficult aspects of Spinoza’s metaphysics: his theory of substance monism, his theory of attributes, and his theory of conatus.

Table of Contents

  1. The Formal Structure of the Ethics
  2. The Basic Metaphysical Picture: Substance, Attributes, and Modes
  3. Substance Monism
    1. Leibniz’s Objection to Spinoza’s Substance Monism Argument
    2. Why Does the One Substance Have Modes?
  4. Attributes
    1. Subjectivism
    2. Objectivism
    3. Modal Parallelism
  5. Conatus
    1. Conatus and Purposive Action
    2. The Conatus Argument
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Original Language
    2. English Translations
    3. Historical Studies
    4. Philosophical Studies

1. The Formal Structure of the Ethics

The Ethics is broken into five parts:

  1. Of God
  2. Of the Nature and Origin of the Mind
  3. Of the Origin and Nature of the Affects
  4. Of Human Bondage, or the Power of the Affects
  5. Of the Power of the Intellect, or of Human Freedom

Part I concerns issues in general metaphysics (the existence of God, free will, the nature of bodies and minds, etc.) Part II concerns two issues related to the mind: (i) what the mind is and how it relates to the body, and (ii) a general theory of knowledge. In Part III, Spinoza presents his theory of emotions (which he calls “affects”) and a fully deterministic human psychology. In Parts IV and V, Spinoza presents his ethical theory.

Each part of the Ethics is broken into definitions of key terms, axioms (assumptions),
propositions (theorems proven on the basis of the definitions, axioms, and the previous propositions), demonstrations (proofs), corollaries (where Spinoza often draws attention to other claims which can be proven on the basis of his propositions, but which are not part of his main argument), and scholia (where Spinoza breaks out of his rigorous structure to comment, argue, or restate the demonstrated material in a more easily accessible way.)

To this classic geometrical structure, Spinoza adds three additions to the Ethics. (1) Spinoza ends Parts I and IV with appendices. In these appendices he comments on the previous part, clarifies his position, and adds new arguments. (2) In Part II and after proposition 13, Spinoza interrupts his argument to include a short discussion on physics and the laws of motion. This part of the Ethics is sometimes called the “Physical Digression,” “Physical Interlude,” or the “Short Treatise on Bodies.” (3) At the end of Part III Spinoza includes an organized list of the definition of the affects (emotions) as argued for in Part III.

When citing the Ethics begin with the Part number, then use the following shorthand:

a Axiom
d Definition
l Lemma
post. Postulate
p Proposition
c Corollary
d demonstration
s Scholium
exp. Explanation

For example, to cite the demonstration of the 14th proposition of Part III one would write “3p14d.” A number of minor variations exist. Some authors also put an “E” at the beginning of the citation to stand for “Ethics” to distinguish the Ethics from Spinoza’s other book written in a geometrical manner, the Principles of Cartesian Philosophy Demonstrated in a Geometrical Manner (1663). For example, the demonstration of the 14th proposition of Part III is often cited as “E3p14d.” Other scholars mark the part number with Roman numerals, thus citing the proposition as “IIIp14d” or “EIIIp14d.”

So why does Spinoza utilize this cumbersome method of proof in the Ethics? Scholars have given a number of different answers to this question. One common explanation concerns how people thought about science in this period. In the 17th century, mathematics was the paradigmatic science. It was widely admired for offering conclusive and incontrovertible proofs which no rational person (who understood them) could reject. Many philosophers attempted to replicate Euclid’s success in other areas and so found other sciences as conclusive and demonstrable as mathematical science. For example, Hobbes attempted to organize political concepts “geometrically” in his Leviathan. Descartes also considered the possibility of organizing his entire philosophy geometrically in the Second Replies, though he never made a serious attempt to do so.) Spinoza, however, geometrically reorganized the first two books of Descartes’ Principles (along with other original material) in his first published book: Principles of Cartesian Philosophy Demonstrated in a Geometrical Manner (1663).

Other scholars argue that there is a deeper reason for Spinoza’s use of the geometrical method. The goal of the Ethics, Spinoza says, is to prove those things that can “lead us, by the hand, as it were, to the knowledge of the human mind and its highest blessedness” (Preface to Part II). Ethics is supposed to be a philosophical therapy which helps its readers to overcome their passions and superstitions and become more rational. Working through the proofs, Spinoza promotes these goals by forcing us to think carefully, and so promotes the therapeutic aim of his book. For more on the purpose of the geometrical method see Wolfson 1958, I 3-32; Bennett 1988, 16-28; Garrett 2003; Nadler 2006, 35-51.

2. The Basic Metaphysical Picture: Substance, Attributes, and Modes

According to Spinoza, everything that exists is either a substance or a mode (E1a1). A substance is something that needs nothing else in order to exist or be conceived. Substances are independent entities both conceptually and ontologically (E1d3). A mode or property is something that needs a substance in order to exist, and cannot exist without a substance (E1d5). For example, being furry, orange, hungry, angry, etc. are modes that need a substance which is furry, orange, hungry, angry, etc. Hunger and patches of orange color cannot exist floating around on their own, but rather, hunger and patches of orange color need something (namely, a substance) to be hungry and have the orange color. Hunger and colors are, therefore, dependent entities or modes.

According to almost all of Spinoza’s predecessors (including Aristotle and Descartes) there are lots of substances in the universe, each with their own modes or properties. For example, according to Descartes a cat is a substance which has the modes or properties of being furry, orange, soft, etc. (Though some have argued that Descartes cannot actually individuate multiple extended substances. See Curley 1988, 15-19; 141-2 n. 9.) Spinoza, however, rejects this traditional view and argues instead that there is only one substance, called “God” or “Nature.” Cats, dogs, people, rocks, etc. are not substances in Spinoza’s view, but rather, cats, dogs, people, rocks, etc. are just modes or properties of one substance. This one substance is simply people-like in places, rock-like in other places, chair-like in still other places, etc.

One can think of substance as an infinite space. Some regions of this one space are hard and brown (rocks), other regions of space are green, juicy, and soft (plants), while still other regions are furry, orange, and soft (cats), etc. As a cat walks across the room all that happens in Spinoza’s view is that different regions of space become successively furry, orange, and soft (See Bennett 1984: 88-92 for more on space and the extended substance in Spinoza).

This one substance has an infinite number of attributes. An attribute is simply an essence; a “what it is to be” that kind of thing. According to Descartes, every substance has only one attribute: bodies have only the attribute of extension, and minds have only the attribute of thought. Spinoza, however, argues against this claim that the one substance is absolutely infinite and so it must exist in every way that something can exist. Thus, he infers that the one substance must have an infinite number of attributes (E1p9). An attribute, according to Spinoza, is just the essence of substance under some way of conceiving or describing the substance (E1d4). When we consider substance one way, then we conceive of its essence as extension. When we consider substance another way, then we conceive of its essence as thought. (See Della Rocca 1996a: 164-167.) While substance has an infinite number of different attributes, Spinoza argues that human beings only know about two of them: extension and thought.

3. Substance Monism

The most distinctive aspect of Spinoza’s system is his substance monism; that is, his claim that one infinite substance—God or Nature—is the only substance that exists.  His argument for this monism is his first argument in Part I of the Ethics.  The basic structure of the argument is as follows:

  1. Every substance has at least one attribute.  (Premise 1, E1d4)
  2. Two substances cannot share the same nature or attribute.  (Premise 2, E1p5)
  3. God has all possible attributes. (Premise 3, Definition of ‘God’, E1d6)
  4. God exists.  (Premise 4, E1p11)
  5. Therefore, no other substance other than God can exist.  (From 1-4, E1p14)

That is, there is only one substance (called “God” or “Nature”) which has all possible attributes.  No other substance can exist because if it existed it would have to share an attribute with God, but it is impossible for two different substances to both have the same attribute.  Spinoza defends each of his four assumptions as follows:

The Argument for Premise One (E1d4)

If a substance existed which did not have any attributes, then (by Spinoza’s definition of attribute at E1d4) the substance would not have an essence.  However, according to Spinoza, it makes no sense to claim that something exists which does not have an essence.  Thus, every substance has at least one attribute.  This premise is not particularly controversial.

The Argument for Premise Two (E1p5)

Spinoza’s argument for the second premise (“Two substances cannot share the same nature or attribute”) is much more controversial.  Here Spinoza argues that if two substances share one and the same attribute, then there is no way to tell the two substances apart.  If substance A and substance B both have attribute 1 as their nature, then in virtue of what are there two different substances here?  Why aren’t A and B just one substance?  Since no cause can be given to explain their distinctness, Spinoza infers that they must actually be the same.  Formally, the argument is as follows:

  1. Two substances are distinguished from each other either by a difference in attributes or a difference in modes.  (Premise 1)
  2. Substance is prior in nature to its modes.  (Premise 2, E1p1)
  3. If two substances A and B are indistinguishable, then they are identical.  (Premise 3)
  4. If substances A and B differ only in attributes, then A and B are two different substances with different natures.  (From 1 and the definition of “attribute.”)
  5. If substances A and B differ only in modes and share an attribute, and if the modes are put to one side and the substances are considered in themselves, then the two substances would be indistinguishable.  (From 1, 2)
  6. But if substances A and B are indistinguishable, then they are identical. (From 3, 5)
  7. Thus, no two substances can share a nature or attribute.  (From 4, 6)

The Arguments for Premise Four (E1p11)

In the demonstration of E1p11, Spinoza explicitly provides a number of different proofs for the existence of a substance with infinite attributes (namely, God.)  One proof is a version of the Ontological Argument also used by Anselm and Descartes.  Spinoza’s argument is interesting, however, because he provides a very different reason for claiming that the essence of each substance includes existence.  Spinoza’s Ontological Argument, once unpacked, is as follows:

  1. When two things have nothing in common, one cannot be the cause of the other (Premise 1, E1p3).
  2. It is impossible for two substances to have the same attribute (or essence) (Premise 2, E1p5).
  3. Two substances with different attributes have nothing in common (Premise 3,  E1p6d).
  4. Thus, one substance cannot cause another substance to exist (From 1, 2, 3.  E1p6).
  5. Either substances are caused to exist by other substances, or they exist by their own nature (Premise 4, E1p7d).
  6. Thus, substances must exist by their own nature (that is, the essence of a substance must involve existence.) (From 4, 5.  E1p7)

This argument differs from the Ontological Arguments offered by Anselm and Descartes in that (i) Spinoza does not infer the existence of God from the claim that our idea of God involves existence and (ii) Spinoza does not assume that existence is a perfection (and so a property).  Spinoza’s argument, therefore, can avoid some of the more common objections to the Ontological proofs as formulated by Descartes and Anselm.  See Earle 1973a and Earle 1973b for a partial defense of Spinoza’s Ontological Argument.

a. Leibniz’s Objection to Spinoza’s Substance Monism Argument

Spinoza’s Argument for Substance Monism is generally deemed a failure by contemporary philosophers.  There are a number of ways to attack the argument.  The most common way is to reject Spinoza’s second premise (E1p5: “That two substances cannot share the same nature or attribute.”)   One of the most popular arguments against this promise was first presented by Leibniz.  Leibniz argued that whereby it might be impossible for two substances to have all of their attributes in common (because then they would be indistinguishable), it may be possible for two substances to share an attribute and yet differ by each having another attribute that is not shared.  For example, one substance may have attributes A and B and another substance has attributes A and C.  The two substances would be distinguishable because each has an attribute the other lacks, but both substances would nevertheless share an attribute.  This objection was first presented by Leibniz to Spinoza himself.  Though Spinoza did not find the objection persuasive, he never offered an explicit reply.  See Della Rocca 2002: 17-22 for a plausible solution on Spinoza’s behalf based upon the conceptual independence of the attributes.

b. Why Does the One Substance Have Modes?

If Spinoza’s Substance Monism Argument were sound, it would prove that the only substance which exists is God or Nature (a substance with an infinite number of attributes).  But why does this one substance have any finite modes (properties)?  Spinoza provides an answer at E1p16.  Here Spinoza argues that “from the necessity of the divine nature there must follow infinitely many things in infinitely many ways (that is, everything which can fall under an infinite intellect)” (E1p16).  Spinoza argues that the greater something is, the greater the number of properties which follow from its nature or essence.  For example, it follows from the nature of a triangle that it has three sides.  Why do triangles have interior angles of 180 degrees?  Because of the kind of things that they are (that is, because of their essence.)

The greater the essence of the thing, the more properties that follow from it.  God’s essence is the greatest possible essence.  Thus, the greatest possible number of properties (that is, an infinite number) must follow from God’s essence or nature.  Thus, an infinite number of finite modes must follow from the essence of God in just the way that certain properties of triangles (having interior angles of 180 degrees, for example) follow from the essence of a triangle.  Because a triangle’s essence is finite only a finite number of properties follow from it; because God’s essence is infinite an infinite number of properties follow from it.  Human beings, chairs, tables, cats, dogs, trees, etc. are some of the properties that follow from God’s essence or nature.

Spinoza claims that one important consequence of this proof is that modes are properties of substance.  The view that modes are properties of substance has been denied by at least one prominent interpreter of Spinoza (Curley 1988: 31-39).  Curley’s view has, however, proven unpopular (See Carriero 1999; Malamed 2009.)  The dominant interpretation today is that modes are properties of the one substance.

4. Attributes

Spinoza’s theory of the attributes (extension, thought, etc.) is the most original, difficult, and controversial aspect of his metaphysics.  According to Descartes, the attribute of a substance is simply the substance’s essence (Principles I.53.)  Given this definition, Descartes infers that each substance has only one attribute.  Spinoza modifies Descartes’s definition at E1d4 and states that “by attribute I understand what the intellect perceives of a substance as constituting its essence.”  The Latin here is “per attributum intelligo id, quod intellectus de substantia percipit, tanquam ejusdem essentiam constituens.”  Spinoza then claims that the one substance (“God” or “Nature”) has an infinite number of attributes (E1d6.)  A number of scholars have found it hard to understand how one substance could have multiple attributes each one of which is “what the intellect perceives … as constituting its essence.”  Either Spinoza is claiming that the one substance has multiple essences, or that the attributes are not really the essence of the substance but only seem to be.

The interpretive problems with Spinoza’s theory of attributes begin with his definition.  In the definition he uses the word ‘tanquam’ which can be correctly translated into English both as ‘as if’ and as ‘as.’  If ‘tanquam’ is translated as ‘as if’, then that translation suggests that the attributes are not really the essence of substance but only seem to be the essence of substance.  If, however, ‘tanquam’ is translated as ‘as’, then that translation would seem to indicate that each attribute really is the essence of substance.  The problem is then to explain how we can have one substance with more than one essence.  Thus, the first problem with Spinoza’s theory of attributes is to explain the relation between the attributes and the essence of substance.

According to some scholars (often called “subjectivists”) each attribute is not really the essence of substance but merely seems to be.  According to these scholars, substance’s essence is in some way “hidden” from the intellect and “unthinkable.”  All we can know is how the essence of the one substance appears to the intellect (either as extension or as thought.)  According to other scholars (often called “objectivists”) each attribute really is the essence of substance.  The problem is then to explain how one substance can have multiple essences and still remain one substance.

The second problem with Spinoza’s theory of attributes is to explain how the attributes are related to one other.  If each attribute really is the essence of the one substance, then how do they relate to each other?  Are they identical?  Or is each attribute really different from every other attribute?  If they are identical, then why does the intellect distinguish them?  If they are different, then how can one substance have more than one essence?  Some subjectivists (such as Wolfson 1958: 142 ff.) argue that there is really only one attribute which is distinguished wrongly into numerous attributes by the intellect.  Objectivists, on the other hand, argue that there is more than one attribute and that they are really distinct from each other.

In summary, there are two major problems with Spinoza’s theory of attributes:

  1. The Attribute-Essence Problem:  How do the attributes relate to the essence of substance?  Are they identical to the essence of substance or distinct?
  2. The Attribute-Attribute Problem:  How do the attributes relate to each other?  Are they identical or distinct?

a. Subjectivism

The most influential defense of the “Subjectivist” interpretation of the attributes is presented by Wolfson 1958 Vol. 1: 142-157.  Wolfson argues that

the two attributes appear to the mind as being distinct from each other.  In reality, however, they are one.  For by [E1p10], attributes, like substance, are summa genera (“conceived through itself”.)  The two attributes must therefore be one and identical with substance.  Furthermore, the two attributes have not been acquired by substance after it had been without them, nor are they conceived by the mind one after the other or deduced one from the other.  They have always been in substance together, and are conceived by our mind simultaneously.  Hence, the attributes are only different words expressing the same reality and being of substance (Wolfson 1958 Vol. 1: 156.)

That is, substance has only one essence and that essence is the sum total of all of its attributes.  The attributes are all identical (and also identical with the substance itself).  The attributes are distinguished from one another merely conceptually (“only different words expressing the same reality”), but in reality the attributes are all one and the same.  The essence of substance is therefore the one attribute extension-thought-etc.  This one attribute cannot be thought as it is, but is instead mentally broken into pieces and considered only partially.  Wolfson thus explicitly provides answers to both the Attribute-Essence Problem and to the Attribute-Attribute Problem.  In both cases Wolfson claims that the relation is identity.  Each attribute is identical to every other attribute (in reality, there is only one “super attribute”) and the essence of substance is this one unthinkable “super attribute.”  Wolfson goes further, however, and also argues that substance is identical to this one unthinkable “super attribute.”

A very different theory of attributes, which also goes by the name of “Subjectivism,” is offered by Bennett.  Bennett argues that the attributes do not constitute the essence of substance at all.  Instead the essence of substance is really the infinite series of finite modes.  The attributes merely appear to constitute the essence of substance.  Bennett disagrees with Wolfson in that Bennett believes “that Nature really has extension and thought, which really are distinct from one another, but that they are not really fundamental properties, although they must be perceived as such by any intellect” (Bennett 1984: 147.)  Thus, Bennett’s solution to the Attribute-Essence Problem is to claim that the essence and attributes are distinct.  But he differs from Wolfson in regard to the Attribute-Attribute Problem.  Here Bennett argues that the attributes are not identical (as Wolfson claims.)

One thing to note here is the looseness of the term “Subjectivism.”  Both Bennett and Wolfson are considered “Subjectivists” because they each deny at least one of the following two claims:

  1. The attributes are really distinct.
  2. The attributes constitute the essence of substance.

Wolfson denies both; Bennett denies only the second.

b. Objectivism

There are significant problems with both Wolfson’s and Bennett’s “Subjectivism.”  The problem is that there is strong textual evidence in favor of the two claims:

  1. The attributes are really distinct.
  2. The attributes constitute the essence of substance.

The argument in favor of (i) is that Spinoza claims at E1p10d that all intellects can conceive of the attributes as really distinct (that is, one without the help of the other.)  Thus, even the infinite intellect (that is, God’s Mind) must conceive of the attributes as really distinct.  But the infinite intellect understands everything exactly as it is
(E1p32).  Therefore, the attributes must be really distinct.  This argument has persuaded almost all recent scholars that (i) is true.

The argument in favor of (ii) also relies on the infinite intellect.  Spinoza claims at E2p3 that the infinite intellect has an adequate and true idea of God’s essence.  But on both Wolfson’s and Bennett’s subjectivist accounts that is not true.  On Wolfson’s account the infinite intellect cannot have an adequate idea of the one “super attribute” extension-thought-etc.  The infinite intellect can only have an idea of the different fragmented pieces, namely, extension, thought, etc.  On Bennett’s account the essence of substance isn’t even an attribute.  Both scholars have to admit that the infinite intellect does not have an adequate idea of the essence of substance, which contradicts Spinoza’s claim at E2p3.  See Della Rocca 1996a: 157-171 for more on the case against Subjectivism.

If both claims (i) and (ii) are true on Spinoza’s view, then the attributes are really distinct, and yet each one constitutes the essence of substance.  This is a significant problem.  How can there be only one substance if this substance has multiple distinct essences?  Edwin Curley answers this question by claiming both that “the attributes of substance satisfy the definition of substance” (Curley 1988: 29) and that the attributes come together to form one essence because “this particular complex is a complex of very special elements” (Curley 1988: 30.)  The attributes on Curley’s view are a collection of an infinite number of substances that come together in much the same way that numbers come together to form a number line.  The number line is a unity composed of an infinite amount of very special elements.

Thus, Curley’s solution to the Attribute-Essence Problem is to claim that each attribute pertains to the essence of substance.  Concerning the Attribute-Attribute Problem, Curley claims that the attributes are really distinct from each other.  A similar view may also have been held by Gueroult 1968 Vol. 1.  Objectivism is often characterized by three theses:

  1. The attributes are really distinct.
  2. The attributes constitute the essence of substance.
  3. The attributes are substances.

The third claim, however, has been disputed by some more recent Objectivists.  Della Rocca in his 1996 book Representation and the Mind-Body Problem in Spinoza offers what is currently the most influential objectivist interpretation of Spinoza’s theory of the attributes.  Della Roccca accepts claims (i) and (ii), but rejects the idea that attributes are themselves substances.  Della Rocca’s interpretation centers on the idea of “referential opacity.”  Della Rocca claims that “a context is referentially opaque if the truth value of the sentence resulting from completing the context does depend on which particular term is used to refer to that object” (Della Rocca 1996a, 122.)  That is, the truth value of a particular sentence depends upon how the objects in the sentence are described.  If the description changes, then the truth value of the sentence may change too.  For example, consider the morning star and the evening star.  The following sentence is true:  Bob believes that the morning star rises in the morning.  However, if you replace ‘the morning star’ without another equally correct description of the same object, then the sentence turns out false.  Because Bob does not know that the morning star and evening star are actually the same thing (namely, Venus) the following sentence is false:  Bob believes that the evening star rises in the morning.  Because the truth-value of the sentence depends upon the description of Venus used in the sentence, this context is referentially opaque.

Della Rocca provides the example of a spy.  One may know that there is a spy in the community and even hate this spy, without knowing that the spy is one’s brother.  In this case the truth-value of sentences such as I hate the spy, I believe that the spy is a spy, etc. all depend upon the term used to pick out the spy.  If we replace ‘the spy’ with the term ‘my brother,’ the truth value of these two sentences changes:  I hate my brother, I believe that my brother is a spy.  Because the truth-value changes when the term used to pick out the person changes, these contexts are referentially opaque.

Della Rocca believes that referential opacity is the key to understanding Spinoza’s theory of attributes.  The idea here is to understand that attribute contexts are referentially opaque.  So, the sentence “the essence of substance is thought” and the sentence “the essence of substance is extension” are referentially opaque contexts.  Della Rocca claims that Spinoza’s definition of attribute should be interpreted as saying: “by attribute I understand that which constitutes the essence of a substance under some description or way of conceiving that substance” (Della Rocca 1996a, 166.)  When substance is considered in one way, then the essence of substance is thought; when substance is considered in another way, then the essence of substance is extension.  What the essence of substance is taken to be will depend upon how the substance is being considered.

By arguing that attribute contexts are referentially opaque, Della Rocca believes that he can avoid the central problem of Subjectivism:  the claim that God misunderstands his own essence (contra E2p3).  Thus, though Della Rocca’s view may at first sound like a form of Subjectivism, it avoids the central problem.  The attributes are really distinct on Della Rocca’s interpretation in that each attribute is the essence of substance under some description of that substance: each really distinct description gives one a different essence.  The attributes also constitute the essence of substance on this view, so long as we add the phrase “under some description or way of conceiving of that substance” to the end.  Della Rocca, however, does not have to accept that attributes are themselves substances.  An attribute is not a substance according to this view (contra Curley); an attribute is simply the essence of a substance under some description or way of conceiving of that substance.

c. Modal Parallelism

How one interprets Spinoza’s theory of attributes will significantly affect the rest of his metaphysics.  For example, one of Spinoza’s most important claims is that “the order and connection of ideas is the same as the order and connection of things” (E2p7.)  That is, the order of modes under the attribute of extension is the same as the order of modes under the attribute of thought.  Spinoza explains this idea in an important and controversial scholium.  He claims that

a circle existing in nature and the idea of the existing circle, which is also in God, are one and the same thing, which is explained through different attributes.  Therefore, whether we conceive nature under the attribute of Extension, or under the attribute of Thought, or under any other attribute, we shall find one and the same order, or one and the same connection of causes, i.e., that the same things follow one another (E2p7s.)

The view that one and the same order exists under each of the attributes is called ‘modal parallelism.’  The word ‘parallelism’ is used because not all scholars believe that the relationship between a body and the mind of that body is identity.  How one interprets modal parallelism in Spinoza will depend upon one’s interpretation of Spinoza’s theory of the attributes.  Two of the most developed and influential recent interpretations of Spinoza’s parallelism are Bennett 1984 (who argues that the mind and body are not identical) and Della Rocca 1996a (who argues that the mind and body are identical).

Bennett and others reject the numerical identity interpretation of parallelism on the grounds that it commits Spinoza to a contradiction.  Spinoza claims that there is no causal interaction between minds and bodies at E3p2.  If he then claimed (so the argument goes) that minds and bodies are identical, then he would seemingly be committed to the following contradiction:  if mind M causally interacts with mind N and body 1 is identical with mind M, then it seems as though body 1 must also causally interact with mind N (thus violating Spinoza’s explicit claims at E3p2.)  This argument is presented by both Bennett 1984, 141 and Delahunty 1985, 197 to argue against the identity of minds and bodies in Spinoza.

But Spinoza does say that the mind and the body are “one and the same thing” conceived in two ways (E2p7s).  What could that mean if not that minds and bodies are identical?  Bennett argues that in Spinoza a mind and a body merely share a part (which he calls a “trans-attribute mode”).  Minds and bodies are not fully identical.  (See Bennett 1984, 141).  One “trans-attribute mode” can combine both with the attribute of thought (creating a mind) and the attribute of extension (creating a body) at the same time.  Thus, my body is a trans-attribute mode combined with the attribute of extension; my mind is that same trans-attribute mode combined with the attribute of thought.  Bennett thus rejects the interpretation of parallelism whereby a body and a mind are one and the same thing.  A body and its parallel mind merely share a part (namely, a trans-attribute mode).

By contrast Della Rocca argues that minds and bodies in Spinoza are fully identical.  Della Rocca argues that the notion of referential opacity (see the Objectivism section above) can allow Spinoza to accept both the identity of minds and bodies without accepting that minds and bodies causally interact.  Della Rocca claims that causal contexts in Spinoza are referentially opaque.  That is, x is the cause of y only under certain descriptions or ways of thinking about x.  It is not the case that the sentence “x causes y” is true under all possible ways of describing or conceiving of x.  For example, “x under a mental description caused y” can be true while “x under a physical description caused y” is false.  Thus, Della Rocca argues that the claim that minds and bodies are identical does not entail that minds and bodies causally interact because whether x caused y or not depends upon how x is described.  (See Della Rocca 1996a, 118-140, 157-167.)

5. Conatus

In Part III of the Ethics, Spinoza argues that each mode (that is, every physical and mental thing) “strives to persevere in its being” (E3p6.)  The word translated into English as “strives” is the Latin “conatus.”  (“Conatus” is also sometimes translated as “endeavor.”)  From the claim that every mode strives to persevere in its being, Spinoza infers that each mode’s conatus is the actual essence (E3p7.)  That is, what it is to be a cat is just to strive in a certain cat-like way.  What it is to be a desk is for the complex body to strive in a certain desk-like way.  Every thing that exists—every particle, rock, plant, animal, planet, solar system, idea, mind, etc.—is striving to survive.  From the claim that the essence of every mode is its striving to persist Spinoza derives much of his physics, psychology, moral philosophy, and political theory in Parts III, IV, and V of the Ethics.

Despite the importance of Spinoza’s theory of conatus, there are a number of interpretive and philosophical difficulties with it and Spinoza’s argument for it.  First, there is the widely debated issue of whether Spinoza’s theory of conatus should be interpreted teleologically or non-teleologically.  Is each mode trying to survive?  Are modes goal-oriented things?  Or is Spinoza simply claiming that everything that modes do helps them to survive (while not claiming that modes are acting purposively)?

Second, Spinoza’s argument for the theory of conatus (which takes place in Part III of the Ethics from propositions 4 to 6) has been subject to considerable scrutiny and many scholars have argued that it is multiply invalid.  A few recent scholars have, however, attempted to defend Spinoza’s argument for his conatus theory against the charge of invalidity.  Garrett 2002, for example, provides an influential defense of the validity of the argument.  Likewise, Waller (2009) provides a partial defense of the first third of the argument.

a. Conatus and Purposive Action

Spinoza clearly denies the claim that God or Nature has a purpose or plan for the universe.  The universe simply exists because it could not fail to exist.  God did not make the universe with any predetermined goal or plan in mind; instead the universe simply follows from God’s essence in just the way that the properties of a triangle follow from the essence of the triangle (E1p16, E1p32c1, E1p33).  In the Appendix to Part I of the Ethics Spinoza claims that

[People] find—both in themselves and outside themselves—many means that are very helpful in seeking their own advantage, for example, eyes for seeing, teeth for chewing, plants and animals for food, the sun for light, the sea for supporting fish.  Hence, they consider all natural things as means to their own advantage.  And knowing that they had found these means, not provided them for themselves, they had reason to believe that there was someone else who had prepared the means for their use … And since they had never heard anything about the temperament of these rules, they had to judge from themselves.  Hence, they maintained that the gods direct all things for the use of men in order to bind men to them and be held by men in the highest honor. … But while they sought to show that Nature does nothing in vain (that is, nothing not of use to men), they seem to have shown only that Nature and the gods are as mad as man.   … Not many words will be required to show that Nature has no end set before it, and that all final causes are nothing but human fictions (Ethics Part I, Appendix.)

The earth does not exist so that we may live on it.  The universe is not designed for the good of human beings.  The universe has no purpose; it simply exists.  These ideas were revolutionary in the seventeenth century and remain controversial even today.

But some scholars (most influentially, Bennett 1984) argue that Spinoza’s rejection of purpose or goals in nature goes much further than a simple rejection of Divine purposes or goals—Bennett argue that Spinoza rejects all purposive or goal directed activities whatsoever, including human purposive action.  The claim that human actions are not purposive or goal-oriented is startling and presents us with a very different theory of what human beings are.

To understand the impact of this claim, consider the following example: if I walk across the room to get a drink of water, we might believe that this activity is purposive or goal-oriented.  I am walking across the room in order to get a glass of water.  My behavior is partly explained in the common sense view by my goal or purpose (that is, getting a drink of water.)  Bennett 1984, 240-251, however, claims that according to Spinoza this explanation of my behavior must be wrong.  According to Bennett’s Spinoza, I do not walk across the room in order to get water.  Rather I walk across the room because my organs were organized in a certain way such that when light strikes my eyes, it moves certain parts of my brain, which in turn moves certain tendons in my legs, which in turn causes my legs to move back and forth in certain ways, carrying my body to the counter, moving my hand toward the water fountain, etc.  That is, my behavior can be fully and completely understood mechanistically, just like a watch.  The springs inside a watch do not move so that the watch may indicate the correct time, rather the clock indicates the correct time because the springs and levers move in a certain way.  Similarly with human beings, they do not walk in order to get to certain places; they get to certain places because they walk.  (When considering a human being under the attribute of thought, Spinoza would claim that certain ideas follow logically from other ideas in just the way that certain effects follow necessarily from certain causes in the physical world.)  In just the way that the universe exists without any purpose or goal, so every action performed by every human similarly is done for no purpose or goal.  We do what we do simply because we could not fail to—our actions simply follow from the organization of our many complex parts.

Bennett’s interpretation of Spinoza as denying all purposive or goal-oriented action is controversial because Spinoza does claim in a number of different places that while the whole of nature has no purpose or ultimate goal, individuals do act purposively.  In the Appendix to Part I, where Spinoza makes his clearest claims against Divine purposes, he also claims that “men act always on account of an end.”  This passage and other similar ones have been a problem for Bennett’s interpretation.  (See Curley 1990 and Bennett 1990 for more on this debate.)

The issue of whether purposive action is possible is important to the interpretation of Spinoza’s theory of conatus.  Does Spinoza’s theory of conatus entail that every physical thing—every animal, plant, rock, planet, solar system, idea, and mind—acts in order to persevere in its own being?  Is all of nature goal-oriented, even though the whole of nature is not?  Some (including Garrett 1999) think so.  If Garrett is right, then Spinoza’s physical theory may be a lot closer to Aristotle’s than it is to Descartes’.  Spinoza does not seem fully consistent on the point.  In the words of one recent scholar, Spinoza is “having trouble getting the blind efficient causality of the new science and the end-governed efficient causality of human activity into the same frame, so to speak” (Carriero 2005, 146.)  When Spinoza attempts to treat all of nature, including human behavior and emotions, in a completely deterministic scientific way—as if human beings were just complicated clocks—he struggles to remain consistent.

b. The Conatus Argument

The argument for Spinoza’s claim that everything strives to persevere in its own being is found at the very beginning of Part III of the Ethics.  The argument is usefully summarized by Garrett 2002 as follows:

  1. The definition of a thing affirms, and does not deny, the thing’s essence, or it posits the thing’s essence, and does not take it away.
  2. While we attend only to the thing itself, and not to external causes, we shall not be able to find anything in it which can destroy it. (from 1)
  3. 3p4 – Nothing can be destroyed except through an external cause. (from 2)
  4. If [things insofar as they can destroy one another] could agree with one another, or be in the same subject at once, then there could be something in the same subject which could destroy it.
  5. [That there could be something in the same subject which could destroy it] is absurd. (from 3)
  6. 3p5 – Things are of a contrary nature, that is, cannot be in the same subject, insofar as one can destroy the other. (from 4-5)
  7. 1p25c – Singular things are modes by which God’s attributes are expressed in a certain and determinate way.
  8. 1p34 – God’s power is his essence itself.
  9. Singular things are modes that express, in a certain and determinate way, God’s power, by which God is and acts. (from 7-8)
  10. No thing has anything in itself by which it can be destroyed, or which takes its existence away. (from 3)
  11. [Each thing] is opposed to everything which can take its existence away. (from 6)
  12. 3p6 – Each thing, as far as it can by its own power, strives to persevere in its being (from 9-10).

That is, Spinoza begins by arguing that no thing can destroy itself (E3p4).  He argues for this claim on the basis of the claim that the definition affirms and does not deny the thing’s essence.  From the claim that no thing can destroy itself, Spinoza then infers that no two things which can destroy each other can be parts of the same whole (E3p5.)  From this claim Spinoza infers that each thing must strive to persevere in its own being (E3p6).

There seem to be numerous invalid inferences here.  The first occurs right at the beginning of the argument.  In the first three lines, Spinoza infers that since a definition of something does not contain anything inconsistent with the thing, that a thing contains nothing contrary to its own nature.  But this inference seems invalid.  If we understand a definition to be a statement of a thing’s essence (see E2d2), then it does validly follow that the essence includes nothing inconsistent with itself (if the essence were internally inconsistent, then it could not exist.)  But it does not follow that a thing cannot have certain accidental properties (not mentioned in the definition) which are capable of destroying the thing.  Thus, Spinoza seems to mistakenly infer a claim about the whole thing (both essential and accidental properties) from a premise which merely concerns the essence.  (See Bennett 1984, 234-237; Della Rocca 1996b, 202-206.  For a recent defense of Spinoza’s argument see Waller forthcoming.)

Another invalid inference occurs toward the end of the argument in lines 6 and 11.  Spinoza infers that since two things cannot both be parts of the same whole, they must actively oppose one another.  However, perhaps they could simply be in a passive relation to one another.  It is one thing to passively resist, and it is quite another to actively resist.  (See Garber 1994, 61-63 for more on this objection and its roots in Leibniz.)  A few recent scholars have attempted to respond to these charges on Spinoza’s behalf.  See, for example, Garrett 2002.

6. References and Further Reading

a. Original Language

  • Gebhart, Carl.  (ed.)  Spinoza Opera. (Heidelberg: Carl Winters, 1925.)
    • This is the standard original language edition of Spinoza’s works.

b. English Translations

  • Edwin Curley, trans.  The Collected Works of Spinoza Vol. 1. (Princeton:  Princeton University Press, 1985.)
    • This translation is the standard English translation.
  • R.H.M. Elwes, trans.  On the Improvement of the Understanding, The Ethics, Correspondence. (New York: Dover, 1955.)
    • An out-of-date English translation first published in the nineteenth century.
  • Samuel Shirley, trans. and Michael Morgan, editor.  Spinoza: Complete Works. (Indianapolis: Hackett, 2002.)
    • The only single volume English translation of Spinoza’s complete works currently available.  Shirley’s translation is often much easier to read, but a little less accurate than Curley’s.

c. Historical Studies

  • Israel, Jonathan.  Radical Enlightenment. (New York: Oxford, 2001.)
    • This book is the most extensive and authoritative historical study of the rise and influence of Spinoza and Spinozism during the Enlightenment (1650-1750.)  Israel argues that Spinoza is the one of the key figures of the Radical Enlightenment.
  • Nadler, Steven.  Spinoza: A Biography. (New York, Cambridge, 1999.)
    • This is the most authoritative biography of Spinoza.
  • Stewart, Matthew.  The Courtier and the Heretic. (W.W. Norton: 2006.)
    • This book is an entertaining novel for the non-specialist on the relationship between Leibniz and Spinoza.

d. Philosophical Studies

  • Bennett, Jonathan.  A Study of Spinoza’s “Ethics” (Indianapolis: Hackett, 1984.)
    • An influential and often critical study of Spinoza.  The book is widely cited in secondary literature.  Much of the recent scholarship on Spinoza has been an attempt to defend Spinoza against Bennett’s criticisms.
  • Bennett, Jonathan.  “Spinoza and Teleology: A Reply to Curley” in Spinoza: Issues and Directions. Edited by Edwin Curley and Pierre-Francois Moreau.  (New York: E.J. Brill, 1990), p. 53-57.
    • An important defense of the view that there is no purposive action in Spinoza.
  • Carriero, John.  “On the Relationship Between Mode and Substance in Spinoza’s Metaphysics” in The Rationalists: Critical Essays on Descartes, Spinoza, and Leibniz.  Edited by Derk Pereboom. (New York: Rowman & Littlefield, 1999), p. 131-164.
    • This article defends the claim that modes are “individual accidents” or “tropes” as opposed to universals (as Bennett maintains.)
  • Carriero, John.  “Spinoza on Final Causality” in Oxford Studies in Early Modern Philosophy Vol. II. Edited by Daniel Garber and Steven Nadler.  (New York: Claredon Press, 2005), 105-148.
    • This article concerns the metaphysics of causation in early modern philosophy and argues that the rejection of final causes in the early modern period forces a change in the conception of efficient causality.  The article clarifies different issues related to the notion of teleology in Spinoza.
  • Curley, Edwin.  Spinoza’s Metaphysics.  (MA: Harvard University Press, 1969.)
    • Curley argues in this book for a controversial interpretation of the mode-substance relation.  Instead of arguing that modes are properties or tropes, he argues that they are merely causally dependent entities.  This conclusion has been widely criticism and is currently unpopular.
  • Curley, Edwin. Behind the Geometrical Method: A Reading of Spinoza’s Ethics. (Princeton:  Princeton University Press, 1988.)
    • A more recent defense of Curley’s controversial interpretation of Spinoza which replies to many of the criticisms offered by Bennett and others.
  • Curley, Edwin.  “On Bennett’s Spinoza:  the Issue of Teleology” in Spinoza: Issues and Directions. Edited by Edwin Curley and Pierre-Francois Moreau.  (New York: E.J. Brill, 1990), p. 39-52.
    • A critique of Bennett’s view that there is no purposive action in Spinoza.
  • Della Rocca, Michael.  Representation and the Mind-Body Problem in Spinoza. (New York: Oxford, 1996a.)
    • This book is one of the most influential books on Spinoza written in English in the last thirty years.  In this book Della Rocca argues for a new interpretation of the attributes, defends the mind-body identity thesis, and works out the necessary and sufficient conditions for representation in Spinoza.
  • Della Rocca, Michael.  “Spinoza’s Metaphysical Psychology” in The Cambridge Companion to Spinoza. Edited by Don Garrett.  (New York:  Cambridge, 1996b.)
    • A study of Spinoza’s deterministic psychology.  One of the most influential parts of this study is Della Rocca’s analysis of various possible interpretations of E3p6.
  • Della Rocca, Michael.  “Spinoza’s Substance Monism” in Spinoza: Metaphysical Themes. Edited by Olli Koistinen and John Biro.  (New York: Oxford, 2002), p. 11-37.
    • This article defends Spinoza’s argument for substance monism from a number of common objections.
  • Della Rocca, Michael.  Spinoza (Routledge Philosophers Series). (Routledge: 2008.)
    • Della Rocca argues for a double use of the Principle of Sufficient Reason in Spinoza.  First, everything has an explanation.  Second, that explanation can be given in terms of explanatory concepts.  Della Rocca uses this double use of the Principle of Sufficient Reason to interpret many of Spinoza’s more difficult doctrines.
  • Earle, William.  “The Ontological Argument in Spinoza” reprint in Spinoza: A Collection of Critical Essays. Edited by Marjorie Grene.  (Garden City: Anchor Press, 1973a), p. 213-219.
    • A limited defense of Spinoza’s ontological argument.
  • Earle, William.  “The Ontological Argument in Spinoza:  Twenty Years Later” in Spinoza: A Collection of Critical Essays. Edited by Marjorie Grene.  (Garden City: Anchor Press, 1973b), p. 220-226.
    • A meditation on the ontological argument and various misinterpretations of it.
  • Garrett, Aaron.  Meaning in Spinoza’s Method.  (Cambridge: 2003.)
    • This book is the most extensive and authoritative study of Spinoza’s geometrical method.  Garrett argues that the method has moral import and is supposed to help readers view the world and themselves in a different way.
  • Garrett, Don.  “Teleology in Spinoza and Early Modern Rationalism” in New Essays on the Rationalists.  Edited by Rocco J. Gennaro and Charles Huenemann.  (New York: Oxford, 1999), p. 310-335.
    • This article defends an Aristotelian interpretation of Spinoza’s theory of teleology.
  • Garrett, Don.  “Spinoza’s Conatus Argument” in Spinoza: Metaphysical Themes. Edited by Olli Koistinen and John Biro.  (New York: Oxford, 2002), p. 127-158.
    • An extremely influential defense of the validity of Spinoza’s Conatus Argument.  Garrett bases his interpretation on a novel theory of inherence.
  • Gueroult, Martial.  Spinoza. 2 Volumes.  (Paris:  Aubier-Montaigne, 1968, 1974.)
    • An extremely influential two volume work among both French and English scholars on the first two parts of Spinoza’s Ethics.  Gueroult presents the classic case against the Subjectivism of Wolfson.  These volumes have not to date been translated into English.
  • Kulstad, Mark.  “Leibniz, Spinoza, and Tschirnhaus: Metaphysics a Trois, 1675-1676”  in Spinoza: Metaphysical Themes. Edited by Olli Koistinen and John Biro.  (New York: Oxford, 2002), p. 221-240.
    • An interesting and useful analysis of the relationship between Leibniz, Tschirnhaus, and Spinoza during a critical period in Leibniz’s philosophical development.
  • Melamed, Yitzhak.  “Spinoza’s Metaphysics of Substance:  The Substance-Mode Relation as a Relation of Inherence and Predication”, Philosophy and Phenomenological Research (1): 2009.  17-82
    • In this article Melamed argues against Curley’s interpretation of modes and in favor of the claim that modes are properties that both inhere in substance and are predicated of substance.
  • Nadler, Steven.  Spinoza’s Ethics: An Introduction. (New York: Cambridge, 2005.)
    • A good general introduction to Spinoza’s Ethics which takes into account much of the recent scholarship.
  • Pruss, Alexander.  The Principle of Sufficient Reason. (New York: Cambridge, 2007.)
    • A recent defense of a weakened form of the Principle of Sufficient Reason.  Pruss both defends the PSR against all of the classical objections to it and provides a number of arguments in favor of it.
  • Waller, Jason.  “Spinoza on the Incoherence of Self-Destruction”, British Journal for the History of Philosophy, 17 (3) 2009, 507-523
    • This article is a defense of the validity of Spinoza’s demonstration of E3p4 (“No thing can be destroyed except through an external cause.”)  Waller argues that the conclusion follows validly given Spinoza’s views on causation and destruction.
  • Wolfson, Harry.  The Philosophy of Spinoza, Vols 1 and 2. (New York: Meridian Books, 1958.)
    • Wolfson’s book contains the classic statement of subjectivism.  The scholarship of the book is extremely impressive, however, Wolfson’s conclusions are often criticized for providing a reductionist account of Spinoza.

Author Information

Jason Waller
Eastern Illinois University
U. S. A.

Nicolas Malebranche: Religion

MalebrancheNicolas Malebranche (1638-1715) was a French philosopher and a rationalist in the Cartesian tradition. But he was also an Oratorian priest in the Catholic Church. Religious themes pervade his works, and in several places he clearly affirms his intention to write philosophy as a Catholic. These religious themes are important for understanding his philosophy. As a rationalist, Malebranche places great emphasis on the importance of Reason. However, because he identifies Reason with the Divine Word, that is, with the Son or Second Person of the Trinity, his rationalism has features that are not common among other forms of rationalism. For example, Reason is a divine person and therefore capable of a wide range of action. In tracing out some of the consequences of this identification of Reason with the Divine Word, the student of Malebranche is quickly immersed in a wide range of his favorite theological and philosophical ideas. The present article will explore three theological ideas which play a special role in Malebranche’s philosophical thought: the Trinity, Original Sin, and the Incarnation.

Table of Contents

  1. A Trinitarian Account of Reason
  2. Love and Order
  3. Original Sin
  4. Universal Reason as External Teacher
  5. Conclusion
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Reference Format
    2. Further Reading

1. A Trinitarian Account of Reason

The features of the doctrine of the Trinity that are of the greatest importance for understanding Malebranche’s philosophical views are the following:

(1) There are three persons of the Godhead, usually known as the Father, the Son, and the Holy Spirit. Malebranche, however, follows the opening verses of the Gospel of John, which calls the Son the Logos. The usual translation of this into English is ‘Word,’ but it can also be translated as ‘Reason,’ and this is how Malebranche understands it. Likewise, Malebranche preferred the Augustinian tradition of giving the name ‘Love’ to the Holy Spirit.

(2) The three persons are consubstantial and coeternal; that is, they are not three distinct Gods but one God and are inseparable. (3) Human beings are created in some way in the image of God, so that there is a sort of analogy, however loose, indirect, or approximate, between the human mind and the Trinity.

The influence of these ideas is recognizable in Malebranche’s account of ideas. Rather than holding ideas to be innate, Malebranche claims that they are found in God. In fact, he identifies them with divine ideas in the traditional theological sense. Theologians attributed ideas to God by drawing an analogy to artistic design. Just as the artisan who makes a product knows his product independently of that product’s actual existence, since the product’s actual existence presupposes the plan or idea by which the artisan makes it in the first place, so God knows His creation by means of productive ideas. Since these ideas cannot be something independent of God Himself, they are simply the divine substance itself insofar as God’s perfections are participable or imitable by creatures: each creature in its own limited way imitates or ‘partitions’ the infinite unlimited perfection of God. By knowing His own unlimited perfection, then, God knows all things He could possibly make, and thus all things that could possibly come to exist. It is this conception of ideas that makes up the primary background for Malebranche’s account of ideas and, pressed by critics, Malebranche through the course of his career placed greater and greater emphasis on this element of his thought that derived from tradition. Malebranche’s place in this tradition is most explicitly developed in the 1696 Preface to the Dialogues, where he quotes a number of passages from Augustine and Thomas Aquinas in order to extract a general description of divine ideas, which he then directly applies to ideas in his account.

Malebranche goes farther than this, into territory that might well have made traditional theologians uncomfortable. Ideas are not merely in God in the sense that they are the divine substance understood in a certain way; they are somehow a manifestation of God’s Reason, which is “coeternal and consubstantial with Him” (LO 614; OC 3:131). The use of the term “consubstantial,” a traditional theological term applied to the Word or Son, that is, the second Person of the Trinity, marks out the direction in which the Oratorian wants to take this line of reasoning. Drawing on, and modifying, the Augustinian tradition, Malebranche suggests that a proper account of the reason to which we regularly appeal must be rooted in the Christian doctrine of the Trinity. God’s Reason is the Word, and we are rational because the Word, the Logos, is our Interior Teacher (an Augustinian phrase). When we attend to various ideas we are learning from the Divine Word, universal Reason; thus Malebranche’s thesis that all things are seen in God is a way of putting the Word at the center of epistemology. Ideas are the province of the second Person of the Trinity; to attribute ideas to ourselves is to commit the serious mistake of attributing to ourselves what only belongs to God. It is to fail to see (to use another Augustinian phrase that is one of the Oratorian’s favorite sayings) that we are not our own light. This Trinitarian move is the foundation for Malebranche’s version of rationalism; Reason is infallible because Reason is quite literally God.

In a Trinitarian account of Reason there is necessarily more to Reason than an account of our rational ideas can cover on its own. As the Interior Teacher, Reason not only illuminates us with ideas, but also guides us in inquiry through interior sentiments, particularly pleasures and pains. Some background explaining Malebranche’s view of the role of freedom in inquiry will help to clarify this unusual twist in his epistemology.

The understanding is “that passive faculty of the soul by means of which it receives all the modifications of which it is capable” (LO 3; OC 1:43). On the other hand, the will is “the impression or natural impulse that carries us toward general and indeterminate good” (LO 5; OC 1:46). The will is both active, although Malebranche is careful to qualify this by the phrase “in a sense” (LO 4; OC 1:46), and free, where freedom is “the force that the mind has of turning this impression toward objects that please us, and making it so that our natural inclinations are directed to some particular object” (OC 1:46; cf. LO 5). When we believe something necessary, it is because “there is in these things no further relation to be considered that the understanding has not already perceived” (LO 9; OC 1:53). We need freedom because there are many cases in which this has not yet occurred, requiring us to direct our attention (another act of the will) in other directions, and, more importantly, because everything the intellect receives has some appearance of truth (we seem to perceive it, after all), so “if the will were not free and if it were infallibly and necessarily led to everything having the appearance of truth and goodness, it would almost always be deceived” (LO 10; OC 1:54). At first glance, this would force us to say that God, as Author of our natures, is the source of our errors. To avoid this premise, Malebranche concludes that God gives us freedom in order that we may under these circumstances avoid falling into error. In particular, we are given freedom so that we may refrain from accepting the merely probable, by continuing to investigate “until everything to be investigated is unraveled and brought to light” (LO 10; OC 1:54).

Therefore, we have an epistemic duty to use our freedom as much as we can, as long as we do not use it to avoid yielding to “the clear and distinct perception of all the constituents and relations of the object necessary to support a well-founded judgment” (LO 10; OC 1:55). How do we know we have reached clear and distinct perception? Malebranche does not appeal to anything intrinsic to the clear and distinct perception itself. Rather, he suggests that we know it through the “inward reproaches of our reason” (LO 10; OC 1:55), “the powerful voice of the Author of Nature,” which he also calls “the reproaches of our reason and the remorse of our conscience” (LO 11; OC 1:57). That is, we know we clearly and distinctly perceive something because when we try to doubt the perception, Reason reproaches us with pangs of intellectual conscience. In addition to these pangs of intellectual conscience, we are led by “a certain inward conviction” and “the impulses felt while meditating” (LO 13; OC 1:60).

It is in the context of discussing these sentiments, in fact, that Reason first appears in the main body of his major work, the Search after Truth, and, since similar sentiments about “the replies He gives to all those who know how to question Him properly” arise in the conclusion to the work, these epistemic sentiments may perhaps be said to frame the entire work. They play an important role in the Dialogues on Metaphysics and on Religion as well. We are told by the character Theodore early in the Dialogues that Reason guides inquiry by dispensing convictions and reproaches (JS 33; OC 12:194), and the point recurs throughout the Dialogues. Malebranche admits that distinguishing this guidance from prejudice can be difficult, but this is perhaps the point of the Search as a manual for avoiding error: by giving us rules and guidelines by which to avoid error, it helps us listen to the voice of Reason (cf. LO xlii-xliii, 529; OC 1:25-26, 2:453-454).

2. Love and Order

Malebranche extends this Trinitarian rationalism in order to give his own take on the claim that human minds are in the image of God, suggesting in the Treatise on Morals that our lives are structured by the Trinity itself:

The Father, to whom power is attributed, makes them to partake of His power, having established them as occasional causes of all the effects that they produce. The Son communicates His wisdom to them and discloses all truths to them through the direct union they have with the intelligible substance that He contains as universal Reason. The Holy Spirit animates them and sanctifies them through the invincible impression they have for the good, and through the charity or love of Order which He infuses into all hearts (OC 11:186; W 163).

This short passage on the way we are in the image of God gives a succinct summary of a number of claims that Malebranche regards as important; it also shows how intimately related to his Trinitarian concerns many of his most distinctive philosophical positions are. First, there is occasionalism, the view that only God is a true cause. Second, there is the union with universal Reason, according to which we are rational only by union with the Divine Word. Third, there is the will understood as the “invincible impression for the good,” which is attributed to the Holy Spirit.

The Holy Spirit is not invoked by Malebranche as often as the Father and the Son are, but there are several passages that hint at the Spirit’s importance; for example, in Elucidation Ten: “For since God cannot act without knowledge and in spite of Himself, He made the world according to wisdom and through the impulse of His love—He made all things through His Son and in the Holy Spirit as Scripture teaches” (OC 3:141; cf. LO 620). Despite receiving less emphasis, this third element, the theory of love that is associated with the Spirit as the theory of Reason is associated with the Son, plays an important role in the account of how we are related to Reason. Recognizing this requires recognizing Reason’s role in morality; Reason is (moral) Order.

The notion of Order is the core of Malebranche’s ethical theory, since "what makes a man righteous is that he loves order and that he conforms his will to it in all things; likewise the sinner is such only because order does not please him in everything and because he would rather have order conform to his own wishes" (OC 3:137; cf. LO 618). Order, in turn, is explained in Augustinian fashion in terms of the divine ideas. Having argued that ideas do not represent things equally noble or perfect, Malebranche goes on to explain the importance of this inequality:

If it is true, then, that God, who is the universal Being, contains all beings within Himself in an intelligible fashion, and that all these intelligible beings that have a necessary existence in God are not in every sense equally perfect, it is clear that there will be a necessary and immutable order among them, and that just as there are necessary and eternal truths because there are relations of magnitude among intelligible beings, there must also be a necessary and immutable order because of the relations of perfection among these same beings. An immutable order has it, then, that minds are more noble than bodies, as it is a necessary truth that twice two is four, or that twice two is not five (LO 618; OC 3:137-138).

We know ideas are not all equal because we judge the perfections of things by means of their ideas, and it is certain that things themselves are not all equal in perfection; some things are distinguished from others in that they have “more intelligence or mark of wisdom” (LO 618; OC 3:137). Because of this inequality, which is effectively an inequality in the moral salience of the things we know by way of ideas, the eternal, immutable intelligible world of ideas is also an eternal, immutable order. This order, however, is not a merely descriptive order. Were there nothing more to divine Order than the theory of ideas, it would be “more of a speculative truth than a necessary law” (LO 618; OC 3:138). Malebranche wants to go farther. This ordering of perfections among the divine ideas has a necessity that constrains even God. To take this system of divine ideas and make it “necessary law,” the Oratorian introduces his theory of love.

This theory, like the theory of ideas, is rooted in an understanding of the divine nature. Just as the theory of ideas is rooted in God as being in general, so the theory of love is rooted in God as good in general. God's goodness is a universal or sovereign goodness; God is "a good that contains all other goods within itself" (LO 269; OC 2:16). As such, God is the only perfect or completely adequate object for love, and, accordingly, God loves Himself perfectly. In loving Himself, He necessarily loves what in Himself represents Himself perfectly, namely, His own self-image, divine Wisdom or universal Reason, which contains the order of all things; and because of this, God always acts according to divine Order. The Father, the Son, and the Holy Spirit are inseparable, and therefore God necessarily has a Love for Order. Malebranche goes so far as to say that "it is a contradiction that God should not love and will order" (LO 594; OC 3:97). It is because of this necessary love that order has a normative aspect; because of this love, order has "the force of law" for all minds (LO 620; OC 3:140), both created and uncreated.

Since God loves Himself, and in so doing operates according to Order, God creates us with an impulse to the most perfect good, namely Himself. This is our will. As Malebranche states,

Only because God loves Himself do we love anything, and if God did not love Himself, or if He did not continuously impress upon man's soul a love like His own, i.e., the impulse of love that we feel toward the good in general, we would love nothing, we would will nothing, and as a result, we would be without a will, since the will is only the impression of nature that leads us toward the good in general… (LO 337; OC 2:126-127)

Because order has the force of law, God makes us according to Order; part of this involves making us to love God alone as our sovereign good. This leaves us with the question of other goods besides God. Malebranche sometimes says that God loves only Himself (for example, LO 364; OC 2:169). However, this is never taken to mean that God does not love other things; in fact, "He loves all His works" (LO 330, 666; OC 2:113, 3:220). The reason is that, as sovereign good, God loves other things in loving Himself. As he notes, "God loves only Himself—He loves His creations only because they are related to His perfections, and He loves them to the extent to which they have this relation—in the final analysis God loves Himself and the things He has created with the same love" (LO 364; OC 2:169-170). On the other hand, not all things bear the same type of relation to Himself; there are, as we noted above, different relations of perfection in Order. Mind is more perfect than body; and, being more perfect, it is more closely related to God, and therefore more lovable. Because of this God cannot will that the mind be subordinated to the body. This is not a metaphysical or logical necessity, but an ethical necessity (an obligation) that presupposes the metaphysical necessity of divine self-love. Given that He loves Order, He ought to will the right ordering of perfections among creatures; this ‘ought’ is an obligation grounded in love.

God, in loving himself, loves sovereign Reason or Order and, because of this love, Order has normative force. When we see in Reason that the soul is more perfect than the body, for instance, we can recognize this principle as not merely a truth, but a law: “the living law of the Father” (JS 238; OC 12:302). Because it is according to Order that Order be loved, and since God always acts out of love of Order, and therefore always in conformity with it, God directs our own love toward Order. Moreover, the law of Order is sanctioned by divine omnipotence itself. Conformity with Order will, in the long run, be rewarded, while divergence from Order will be punished. In one key respect, however, Order is not like other laws. In a case of human law, we can evaluate a law, and perhaps reject it, by considering higher principles than those embodied in the law itself. Because it is the highest law, this can never be the case with Order; when we evaluate the goodness or rationality of any law, we can only do so by comparing it to Order. As divine, Order is the good in general; as Reason, Order is what makes anything rational. Order, in short, is authoritative in every significant way. This authority is essential to Malebranche’s discussion of human nature in its natural, 'prelapsarian' state, that is, its state prior to the Fall.

3. Original Sin

We know that God acts according to Order, and that, therefore, everything God creates is originally in conformity with Order. Because Reason shows us the divine ideas, we have cognitive access to Order, and therefore know the original, natural state of human beings (what God created human beings to be) despite not being in it ourselves:

But to speak accurately of innocent man, created in the image of God, we must consult the divine ideas of immutable order. It is there that we find the model of a perfect man such as our father was before his sin (JS 65; OC 12:103).

On this view, our natural state is nothing other than our ideal ethical state; we are most natural when we are perfect. What we find in “the model of the perfect man” is in some ways like us, but in some ways not. Like us, Adam in his original state was made in such a way as to be constituted by two relations, one to sensible goods and one to Reason. This twofold union, of mind to God and mind to body, looms large in Malebranche’s thought, and he sees it in terms borrowed from St. Augustine. Our union to God is what elevates us, and from it “the mind receives its life, its light, and its entire felicity”; however, our excessive attachment to our body “infinitely debases man and is today the main cause of all his errors and miseries” (LO xxxiii; OC 1:9). This intimate union of ethical, epistemological, metaphysical, and theological themes is characteristic of Malebranche’s thinking; a deviation from ethical perfection entails a corruption of nature and an obscuring of our cognitive abilities, and this deviation from ideal is nothing other than distraction from divine Reason.

However, if this is so, Adam (man as God originally created him) must differ from us in not being able to enjoy sensible goods in a way that ever conflicted with, or distracted from, the good of sovereign Reason. God works according to general laws, as Order requires, but as the general laws now stand, it is very easy for our union with bodies to interfere with our union with Reason. Therefore, there must have been some special characteristic in Adam’s situation that gave him greater control over his sensory union with the body. Because Adam was created to be subject only to God, he merited a special ability to maintain his relationship with divine Reason (JS 233; OC 12:296). Since God always acts according to Order, He cannot subject the mind to the body because this would violate Order by subjecting the more noble to the less noble. Malebranche interprets this to mean that something must have been in place to make it possible for Adam not to be distracted from Reason by bodies. In the Dialogues Theodore tells Aristes precisely what this something must have been:

And conclude from all this that prior to sin there were exceptions favoring human beings in the laws of the union of the soul and the body. Or, rather, conclude from it that there was a law which has been abolished, by which the human will was the occasional cause of that disposition of the brain by which the soul is shielded from the action of objects though the body is struck by them, and that thus despite this action it was never interrupted in its meditations and ecstasy. Do you not sense some vestige of this power in yourself when you are deeply absorbed in thought and the light of truth penetrates and delights you? (JS 65; OC 12:103)

When we look at what should be natural to us, and therefore what made our original state different from our current state, we may perhaps find it surprising that it involves a special ability to control our brains - an ability we now unnaturally lack. Although, intriguingly, Malebranche thinks we still have traces of it when we are “deeply absorbed in thought.”

Examination of ourselves in light of Reason, therefore, leads us to conclude that we are currently in a state of disorder. As Malebranche illustrates, alluding to the letter of Paul to the Romans, “each of us is sufficiently aware of a law in himself that captures and disorders him, a law not established by God because it is contrary to the immutable order of justice, which is the inviolable rule for all His volitions” (LO 580; OC 3:72). In practice, this disorder is an excessive concern with bodies, a concern so strong that it is a pathological dependence. We treat bodies, rather than God, as our true good of the mind. This makes us exalt our union with bodies over our union with Order, in the process running afoul, of course, of principles of Order (principles like “bodies are not worthy of love” and “all the love that God places in us must end in Him”). Given that this motion of love toward good is the will, and given that the will governs attention, we are driven to attend more to sensible matters than their ethical importance and value for inquiry would merit. While the senses are not corrupt in themselves, then, our excessive dependence on them is an essential feature of the corruption of our cognitive capacities. Malebranche regards these matters, at least at a very general level, as common knowledge.

For Malebranche, original sin is not purely a doctrine known on faith because it is something of which he thinks we can all be conscious of in ourselves, by comparing ourselves, known by interior sentiment, with Order, which is known clearly by ideas but obscurely by the interior sentiments it effects. In other words, we can recognize our disorder through moral principles or, more obscurely, through the feelings of conscience. Through faith we learn important details about this disorder, particularly about its history, some of which we could not otherwise know; the disorder itself, however, is something everyone can recognize. Reason teaches us that there is a way things should be; experience shows us that we are not the way we should be. What is more, experience seems also to suggest that the reason we are not the way we should be is not that we cannot be so, at least in any absolute sense. Malebranche does not develop the idea, but it seems suggested by Theodore’s statement in the Dialogues that we can still experience “some vestige of this power” (JS 65; OC 12:102). In general our minds are clouded and confused, but on rare occasions, we go beyond this.

Furthermore, because it affects the way we interact with sensible goods, the disorder of original sin has serious epistemic consequences. In particular, “the mind constantly spreads itself externally; it forgets itself and Him who enlightens and penetrates it, and it lets itself be so seduced by its body and by those surrounding it that it imagines finding in them its perfection and happiness” (LO 657; OC 3:203). Our primary union is with sovereign Reason, but distracted by our union with sensible things, we treat this latter union as if it were more important; and because “we cannot increase our union with sensible things without diminishing our union with intelligible truths” (LO 415; OC 2:257), we ignore our union with universal Reason to the extent we devote our attention to sensible things. The reason, Malebranche thinks, is that we enjoy making judgments, and therefore try to have this pleasure without first consulting Reason (LO 649; OC 3:189). This trait bodes ill for us if we are interested in avoiding error, as we shall see. For now what is interesting is just how sharply this error-inducing dependence on the body differentiates human nature in its original and ideal state from human nature as we currently find it. There is a sort of inevitability about some aspects of our dependence on the body. Our ideas are clouded, our attention becomes tired (JS 65; OC 12:103), and in practice there is little we can do about this. Malebranche is clear that this was not the case with Adam, due to the special power over the body we have already noted, a power that we (at least beyond a certain degree) conspicuously lack.

Since we have lost the ability to govern our brains properly because its presence in us was linked by principles of Order to our merit, we now must struggle to overcome disturbances Adam in Eden would easily have overcome. There is a sense in which this has been a fall from intelligence, since our thought is now subject to our body’s limitations and thus we are naturally inclined to make stupid mistakes. Prior to sin, Adam was not stupid enough to think that bodies were the real cause of his pleasure (LO 593; OC 3:96). We, however, have become that stupid. This is the root of Malebranche’s diagnosis of the psychological basis for the claim that bodies are true causes, a claim he considers to be the most dangerous philosophical error original sin has spawned. This brings us immediately to the motivation for Malebranche’s occasionalism, his view that God alone is a true cause.

For Malebranche, a pagan worldview follows closely on, and is perhaps the primary consequence of, original sin. It is this recognition that mediates between his arguments against necessary connection and his general views; it is by means of their ethical role, as correctives to the presumptions of the pagan mindset, that the arguments interest him; see Gouhier’s excellent discussion (1926, pp. 108-114). Gouhier’s phrase for this pagan worldview, la philosophie du serpent, the philosophy of the serpent, captures Malebranche’s view perfectly. Occasionalism is an ethical antidote, or at least an ethical treatment, for our tendency to idolatry, and, in particular, for an especially pernicious instance of this idolatry:

If the nature of pagan philosophy is a chimera, if this nature is nothing, we must be advised of it, for there are many people who are mistaken with respect to it. There are more than we might think who thoughtlessly attribute to it the works of God, who busy themselves with this idol or fiction of the human mind, and who render to it the honor due only to the Divinity. (LO 668; OC 3:223-224)

The philosophical superstition of causal powers or efficacious natures is but one more sad example of the terrible failure of human nature to live up to the demands of Order; it is but one more expression of the “secret opposition between God and man” (LO 657; OC 3:204). It has its root in a religious failing, the failure to give God the credit He is due.

4. Universal Reason as External Teacher

Even though original sin puts our cognitive capacities in a wretched state, Malebranche does not throw up his hands in despair, nor does he resort to skepticism. The reasons for Malebranche’s optimism all have to do with the active and personal role played by universal Reason in human life. Without his personal role of sovereign Reason, despair and skepticism would be unavoidable. With it, Malebranche can afford to be optimistic.

The first reason for Malebranche’s optimism is that we are never entirely cut off from the teaching of Reason. However, much of our perverse fascination with bodily goods may obscure the guidance, yet Reason still guides us. Not only does Reason still illuminate us with ideas, He “teaches us inwardly” when we take the trouble to engage in philosophical meditation (LO 13; OC 1:61). Reason still encourages, warns, and rebukes us as our intellectual conscience. Although prejudices resulting from original sin have made it difficult to find truth, knowledge is still possible.

The second reason that Malebranche can be optimistic is that Reason has not been idle in the face of our perversity. This is seen most clearly in the Incarnation. In more secularly-minded times this may be the hardest bit of Malebranche’s system to wrap one’s mind around; even someone willing to allow Reason an active role in guiding inquiry might balk at taking the Incarnation as an essential part of epistemology. It is not, however, an ad hoc addition to the Oratorian’s other claims. It would, indeed, be rather strange if he did not think along these lines, given other claims he makes. Reason is the second Person of the Trinity, the Logos or divine Word; the Word is, in the opening words of the gospel of John, the light of all who come into the world, and also is the Word made flesh. It is Reason that we consult in inquiry; Reason illuminates us with ideas, judges our actions, rebukes us for bad uses of freedom and rewards us for good. Given all this, it is not surprising that Reason takes an active and personal hand in fixing the epistemological and ethical mess in which fallen humanity finds itself; Malebranche has already insisted that Reason takes an active and personal hand in a number of epistemological and ethical areas.

In the Incarnation, therefore, the divine Word has resorted to a new method of teaching in its attempt to counteract our fallen condition:

The Son of God, who is the wisdom of God or eternal truth, was made man and became sensible to make Himself known to crude and carnal men. He wished to instruct them by means of what was blinding them; He wished to lead them to His love, to free them from sensible goods by means of the same things that were enslaving them. Dealing with fools, He used a kind of foolishness to make them wise (LO 367; OC 2:124. Cf. also LO 417-418; OC 2:260-261).

The divine Word took physical form because human beings have an excessive love for sensory things. According to Malebranche, this teaches us several things. First, in our own teaching we should invest intelligible truth with the sort of presentation that would in some way appeal to the senses. This can be overdone, of course. It is being done correctly only when it elevates us to the intelligible rather than flattering the senses, or, more specifically, when it causes people to withdraw inward in order to think and meditate rather than outward in order to be entertained by sensible things (cf. LO 418; OC 2:261).

Malebranche also contemplates about Wisdom becoming sensible “in order to condemn and sacrifice in its person all sensible things.” He does not elaborate much on this phrase, but the Preface to the Search makes it clear enough. He claims that one of the lessons the Incarnation is meant to teach us is “the scorn we should have for all objects of the senses” (LO xxxviii; OC 1:18). By uniting Himself with a body, he exalted to the highest dignity anything could have, namely, union with God; it became “the most estimable of sensible things.” This “most estimable of sensible things,” however, was subjugated to divine truth to the point of suffering and death. The idea is that if even the most estimable sensible thing should be held less important than truth and order, than all sensible things should be regarded as less important than truth and order. From this Malebranche concludes that “we must gradually become accustomed to disbelieving the reports our senses make about all the bodies surrounding us, which they always portray as worthy of our application and respect.” As he asks rhetorically in Treatise on Nature and Grace, “did not Jesus Christ sacrifice and destroy, in his person, all grandeurs and sensible pleasures? Has not his life been for us a continual example of humility and of penitence?” (R 131-132; OC 5:53). In effect, Malebranche advocates others to take Jesus Christ as an epistemological model. It is perhaps not common to appeal to epistemological rather than ethical exemplars, but in Malebranche’s philosophy epistemology and ethics are closely related. In fact, there are passages that suggest that he considers them to be essentially the same thing. Consider, for example, the following passage, which opens

Error is the cause of men’s misery; it is the sinister principle that has produced the evil in the world; it generates and maintains in our soul all the evils that afflict us, and we may hope for sound and genuine happiness only by seriously laboring to avoid it (LO 1; OC 1:39).

The error here is both intellectual and moral. That it is both appears to be necessitated by the role of the will. Every error is a misuse of will contrary to the guidance of Reason, and therefore can be treated as an immoral rebellion against Reason (cf. LO 8-11; OC1:50-54). Since the Incarnation involves the perfect union of body, mind, and divine Word, the incarnate Word is a paradigm case of perfect orderly relation among the three, and therefore in itself serves as part of Reason’s pedagogy, as “the rule of beauty and of perfection” (R 123; OC 5:41) against which we must measure ourselves.

The third way in which Malebranche thinks the incarnate Word extends its work of teaching the human race is the most obvious, through explicit moral teaching, which communicates to us “in a sensible, palpable way the eternal commands of the divine law,” so as to reinforce its too-often-ignored inner promptings (JS 81; OC 3:121). Related to this, Malebranche considers the teaching of the Church to be one form that Reason’s teaching takes. That is, the Church is “a visible authority emanating from incarnate Wisdom,” extending that moral teaching through time (JS 81; OC 3:121). This is in part necessary because Reason is interested in teaching “the poor, the simple, the ignorant, and those who cannot read,” not merely “those who have enough life, as well as mind and knowledge, to discern truth from error” (JS 255-256; OC 12:322-323). Reason’s exercise of visible teaching authority has not ceased, but rather continues in the Church, which continues Reason’s work of compensating for human failings.

It is unsurprising, then, that Malebranche attacks the Protestant notion of sola scriptura as not merely theologically problematic but also philosophically irrational. Even if the author of the Gospel of Matthew were the apostle, and even if we can suppose there was no corruption in the transmission of the text, we cannot base our faith on the words we read there unless we have an infallible authority teaching that the evangelist was inspired by God. The only infallible authority is God Himself, so the Holy Spirit must either reveal the inspiration of Scripture to each person individually or to the church as a trust for all; of this choice, Malebranche says, “the latter is much more simple, more general, more worthy of providence than the former” (JS 256; OC 12:323). Even if we granted that God revealed to each individual that the text was inspired, Malebranche thinks that this is far from adequate; after you recognize the text as inspired you still must come to understand it. Since God wills for all people to arrive at knowledge of the truth, there must be something to help lead us to it, and again the choice is between inspiration of each person individually or the church collectively. But, states Malebranche, it is absurd to attribute to each individual person the divine assistance one denies to the entire church in assembly, given that the church preserves tradition and, more than any individual, deserves that Jesus Christ guarantee its protection. Jesus imitates the Father as much as is possible; therefore “He will never act in a certain person in a particular manner without some particular reason, without some kind of necessity” (JS 258; OC 12:325). Since it is generally sufficient for Christ to preserve the faithful by preserving the Church’s authority and infallibility in matters of faith, it is absurd and presumptuous to expect special enlightenment by reading Scripture on one’s own, just as it is absurd and presumptuous to expect God to make exceptions to natural laws for one’s personal convenience.

The existence of a church or divine society (with authority, scripture, teaching, and rituals) makes it possible for Reason to do the most good to the most people in the simplest way, preparing for the restoration even of those who do not have the leisure or ability to do rigorous philosophical meditation (JS 257-258; OC 12:323-324). The graces of enlightenment and sentiment (R 151; OC 5:97) extend the dual teaching function of Reason discussed previously, namely, enlightenment by ideas and guidance by sentiments. These graces form and guide the Church, making certain aspects of its teaching, for example, preaching on the basis of Scripture, an infallible authority on whose basis arguments almost like demonstrations can be formed. In Malebranche’s view, Reason is therefore the foundation for the infallibility of the Catholic Church in matters of faith and morals. He was quite right in saying that his philosophy was a Catholic philosophy.

5. Conclusion

There are a number of ways in which Malebranche’s religious interests affect his philosophical discussion.

(1) Reason has the features of the Second Person of the Trinity, that is, the Son or Word of God. Reason is a divine person. This allows Malebranche to attribute a wider range of activities to Reason than could be attributed to an impersonal reason.

(2) The Trinitarian influence helps to clarify why Malebranche has no problem with talking as if Reason, in its aspect of Order, constrained even God: he has a Trinitarian account of why God must act according to Order.

(3) Original sin plays an extraordinarily important role in Malebranche’s philosophy, to such an extent that even Malebranche’s discussion of very philosophical topics, like the question of whether there are causal powers, is affected by his understanding of original sin and its tendency to drag us away from attentive meditation on divine ideas in Reason.

(4) There is no question that Malebranche’s philosophy is Catholic throughout. Purely Catholic themes and ideas arise throughout, to such an extent that he does not hesitate to bring Catholic doctrines about the Incarnation or the Church into his philosophical discussions.

These are only a few examples. There are many other ways in which Malebranche’s religious views and practices are reflected in his philosophy: his discussions of grace and providence, his theodicy, his relation to the French School of Spirituality founded by Bérulle, and more. Many of these have only just begun to be studied in any detail. If, however, we were to examine every way in which Malebranche’s philosophy were influenced by his religious views, this would not be any different from a complete examination of every facet of his philosophy.

6. References and Further Reading

a. Reference Format

In this article the following reference format for Malebranche’s works has been used:

(LO 418; OC 2:261; cf. also R 131-132; OC 5:53)

The English translation is given first, with its page number; followed by ‘OC’ to indicate the standard French edition, the Oeuvres Complètes, with the volume and page number; particularly notable analogous references follow the “cf. also.” At times, when reference is intended to two different passages equally, the following format has been used:

(LO 330, 666; OC 2:113, 3:220)

The English translations are listed first, while their corresponding pages in the Oeuvres Complètes are listed in order after the semicolon. Thus “OC 2:113” corresponds to “LO 330” and “OC 3:220” corresponds to “LO 666.” Where the passage as quoted in the article deviates from the English translation, this is noted by the following format:

(OC 12:196; cf. JS 147)

The edition abbreviations that have been used are:

JS: Dialogues on Metaphysics and on Religion, Nicholas Jolley and David Scott, eds. New York: Cambridge University Press, 1997.

LO: The Search after Truth, Thomas Lennon and Paul Olscamp, eds. New York: Cambridge University Press, 1997.

OC: Oeuvres Complètes de Malebranche, 20 vols., André Robinet, ed. Paris: J. Vrin, 1958-84.

R: Treatise on Nature and Grace, Patrick Riley, ed. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1992.

W: Treatise on Ethics, Craig Walton, ed. Dordrecht: Kluwer, 1993.

Current scholarship on the role of religion in Malebranche’s philosophy is fairly limited, and what exists is somewhat uneven. The following are suggested as useful for those who wish to study this topic. Some of them discuss the matter in its own right, while others simply raise important questions and topics for further investigation in the course of discussing other things.

b. Further Reading

  • Arnauld, Antoine. On True and False Ideas, Elmar Kremer, ed. Lewiston: Edwin Mellen Press, 1990. This important work, occasioned by Malebranche’s views on grace, began the long-lasting dispute between Arnauld and Malebranche.
  • Astell, Mary, and Norris, John. Letters Concerning the Love of God, E. Derek Taylor and Melvyn New, eds. London: Ashgate, 2005. John Norris was a British Malebranchean; his correspondence with Mary Astell is an excellent resource for identifying features of Malebranche’s thought that would have been considered especially relevant to religion in the period.
  • Connell, Desmond. The Vision in God: Malebranche’s Scholastic Sources, Paris: Nauwelaerts, 1967. Connell’s book, despite its relatively limited topic, is a good beginning for those interested in looking at the question of how Malebranche’s thought relates to the broader context of Catholic thought out of which it emerges.
  • Gouhier, Henri. La philosophie de Malebranche et son expérience religieuse, 2nd ed., Paris: J. Vrin, 1948.
  • Gouhier, Henri. La vocation de Malebranche, Paris: J. Vrin, 1926. This and the immediately preceding work are still the must-read texts for any study of the relation between Malebranche’s religion and his philosophy.
  • Guéroult, Martial. Malebranche, 3 vols. Paris: Aubier, 1955-59. This rather extensive work discusses a number of religion-related issues in Malebranche, and has some particularly notable discussions of Malebranche’s Augustinianism.
  • Jolley, Nicholas. The Light of the Soul: Theories of Ideas in Leibniz, Malebranche, and Descartes. In the course of his discussion of theories of ideas Jolley raises a number of key questions that have to be considered by anyone interested in the relation between religion and philosophy in Malebranche.
  • Nadler, Steven. Arnauld and the Cartesian Philosophy of Ideas, Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1989. Among other things, Nadler considers the important question of why Arnauld chose to begin his attack on the Treatise on Nature and Grace with a criticism of the philosophy of the Search after Truth.
  • Radner, Ephraim. Spirit and Nature: A Study of 17th Century Jansenism, New York: Crossroad, 2002. Radner is mostly concerned with the theological controversies over Jansenist appellants, but the dispute between Arnauld and Malebranche is treated as important background to this religious question.
  • Reid, Jasper. “Malebranche on Intelligible Extension,” British Journal of the History of Philosophy 11:4 (2003), 581-608. An excellent demonstration of how considering Malebranche’s theological interests can clarify puzzles arising elsewhere in his philosophy.
  • Robinet, André. Système et existence dans l’oeuvre de Malebranche, Paris: J. Vrin, 1965. This work contains good, albeit occasionally short, discussions of various religious issues in Malebranche’s works (notably original sin).
  • Schmaltz, Tad. Malebranche’s Theory of the Soul: A Cartesian Interpretation. New York: Oxford University Press, 1996. This work only obliquely discusses matters relevant to religious themes in Malebranche’s philosophy, but it is currently the best discussion of the diverse roles Malebranche attributes to sentiment.

Author Information

Brandon Watson
Austin Community College
U. S. A.

Cheng Hao (Cheng Mingdao, 1032—1085)

Cheng_HaoCheng Hao, also known as Cheng Mingdao, was a pioneer of the neo-Confucian movement in the Song and Ming dynasties, which is often regarded as the second epoch of the development of Confucianism, with pre-Qin classical Confucianism as the first, and contemporary Confucianism as the third. If neo-Confucianism is to be understood as the learning of li (conventionally translated as “principle”), then Cheng Hao and his younger brother Cheng Yi can be regarded as the true founders of neo-Confucianism, as with them li came to be regarded as the ultimate reality of the universe for the first time in Chinese history . Cheng Hao’s unique understanding of the ultimate reality is that it is not some entity but rather is the “life-giving activity.” This understanding strikes a similar tone to Martin Heidegger’s Being of beings which was created almost a millennium later. Assuming the identity of li and human nature, Cheng Hao argues that human nature is good, since what is essential to human nature is humanity (ren), also the cardinal virtue in Confucianism, and this is nothing but this life-giving activity. A person of ren is the one who is in one body with “ten thousand things” and therefore can feel their pains and itches just as one can feel them in one’s own body. This is an idea central to the whole idealist school (xinxue, learning of heart-mind) of the neo-Confucian movement, a movement culminating in Wang Yangming.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Works
  2. Principle
  3. Goodness of Human Nature
  4. Origin of Evil
  5. Moral Cultivation
  6. Influence
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Life and Works

Cheng Hao was born in Huangpi of the present Hubei Province in Mingdao Year 1 of Emperor Ren of the Song dynasty (1032) and so is also called Mr. Mingdao. He and his younger brother Cheng Yi (1033-1107) are often referred to as “the two Chengs” by later Confucians. Growing up, the brothers moved quite often as their father, Cheng Xiang, was appointed as a local official in various places. In 1046, his father became acquainted with Zhou Dunyi (1016-1073), one of the so-called “five Confucian masters” of the Northern Song. He sent Cheng Hao and Cheng Yi – who themselves turned out to be the other two of the five masters – to study with Zhou for about a year. In 1057, after passing the civil service examination, Cheng Hao followed in his father’s footsteps and started his own career as a local official, culminating in his initial participation in (1069) and eventual withdrawal from (1070) the reform movement led by Wang Anshi (1021-1086). Cheng Hao returned to Luoyang after 1072 and continued to assume a few minor official positions, but he spent most of his time studying and teaching Confucian classics together with his brother. During this period, the brothers also had frequent discussions with the final two of the five masters, Shao Yong (1011-1077) and Zhang Zai (1020-1077). The former was their neighbor in Luoyang, and the latter was their uncle.

Cheng Hao’s philosophical ideas are largely developed in conversations with his students, many of whom recorded his sayings. In 1168, Zhu Xi (1130-1200) edited some of these recorded sayings in Chengs’ Surviving Sayings (Yishu) in 25 volumes, in which 4 volumes are attributed to Cheng Hao and 11 volumes to Cheng Yi. The first 10 volumes are sayings by the two masters, where in most cases it is not clearly indicated which saying belongs to which brother. In 1173, Zhu Xi edited Chengs’ Additional Sayings (Waishu) in 12 volumes, including those recorded sayings circulated among scholars and not included in Yishu (in most cases, it is not indicated which saying belongs to which Cheng). As Zhu Xi himself acknowledged that the authenticity of sayings in this second collection is mixed, it should be used with caution. Before Zhu Xi edited these two works, Yang Shi (1053-1135), one of the common students of the two Chengs, rewrote some of these sayings in a literary form in The Purified Words of the Two Chengs (Cuiyan). However, it mostly represents Cheng Yi’s views. Cheng Hao’s own writings, mostly official documents, letters, and poetry, are collected in the first four volumes of Chengs’ Collected Writings (Wenji). In addition, Cheng Hao wrote a correction of the Great Learning, which is included in Chengs’ Commentary on Classics (Jingshuo). All of these are now conveniently collected in the two volume edition of Works of the Two Chengs (Er Cheng Ji) by Zhonghua Shuju, Beijing (1981).

2. Principle

What is called neo-Confucianism in Western scholarship is most frequently called lixue, or the learning of li (commonly translated as “principle”), in Chinese scholarship. Lixue refers to neo-Confucianism in the Song and Ming (and sometimes Qing) dynasties. However, although “neo-Confucianism” was originally used to translate lixue, it is now sometimes understood more broadly than lixue to include Confucianism in the Tang Dynasty which preceded it. Cheng Hao and his younger brother Cheng Yi can be properly regarded as the founders of neo-Confucianism as the learning of principle. Although Shao Yong, Zhou Dunyi, and Zhang Zai are often also treated as neo-Confucians in this sense, it is in Cheng Hao and Cheng Yi that li first becomes the central concept in a philosophical system. Cheng Hao makes a famous claim that “although I have learned much from others, the two words tian li are what I grasped myself” (Waishu 12; 425). Tian is commonly translated as “heaven,” although it can also mean “sky” or “nature.” By combining these two words, however, Cheng Hao does not mean to emphasize that it is a principle of heaven or a heavenly principle but simply that heaven, the term traditionally used to refer to the ultimate reality, is nothing but principle (see Yishu 11; 132), and so tian li simply means “heaven-principle.” As a matter of fact, not only tian, but many other terms such as “change” (yi), dao, shen (literally “god,” but Cheng Hao focuses on its meaning of “being wonderful and unfathomable” ), “human nature” (xing), and “lord” (di) are all seen as identical to principle. For example, Cheng Hao claims that “what the heaven embodies does not have sound or smell. In terms of the reality, it is change; in terms of principle, it is dao; in terms of its function, it is god; in terms of its destiny in a human being, it is human nature” (Yishu 1; 4). “Tian is nothing but principle. We call it god to emphasize the wonderful mystery of principle in ten thousand things, just as we call it lord (di) to characterize its being the ruler of events ” (Yishu 11; 132). He even identifies it with heart-mind (xin) (Yishu 5; 76) and propriety (li). Because Cheng Hao thinks that all these terms have the same referent as principle, his philosophy is often regarded an ontological monism.

From this it becomes clear in what sense Cheng Hao claims that he grasps the meaning of tian li on his own. After all he must be aware that not only the two words separately, tian and li, but even the two words combined into one phrase, tian li, had appeared in Confucian texts before him. So what he means is that principle is understood here as the ultimate reality of the universe that has been referred to as heaven, god, lord, dao, nature, heart-mind, and change among others. In other words, with Cheng Hao “principle” acquires an ontological meaning for the first time in the Confucian tradition. Thus Cheng Hao claims that “there is only one principle under heaven, and so it is efficacious throughout the world. It has not changed since the time of three kings and remains the same between heaven and earth” (Yishu 2a; 39). In contrast, everything in the world exists because of principle. Thus Cheng Hao claims that “ten thousand things all have principle, and it is easy to follow it but difficult to go against it” (Yishu 11; 123). In other words, things prosper when principle is followed and disintegrate when it is violated. One of the most unique ideas of Cheng Hao is that ten thousand things form one body, and he tells us that “the reason that ten thousand things can be in one body is that they all have principle” (Yishu 2a; 33).

While principle is the ontological foundation of ten thousand things, Cheng Hao emphasizes that, unlike Plato’s form, it is not temporally prior to or spatially outside of ten thousand things. This can be seen from his discussion of two related pairs of ideas. The first pair is dao and concrete things (qi). After quoting from the Book of Change that “what is metaphysical (xing er shang) is called dao, while what is physical (xing er xia) is called concrete thing” (Yishu 11; 119), Cheng Hao immediately adds that “outside dao there are no things and outside things there is no dao” (Yishu 4; 73). In other words, what is metaphysical is not independent of the physical; the former is right within the latter. The second pair is principle (dao, human nature, god) and vital force (qi). In Cheng Hao’s view, “everything that is tangible is vital force, and only dao is intangible” (Yishu 6; 83). However, he emphasizes that “human nature is inseparable from vital force, and vital force is inseparable from human nature” (Yishu 1; 10), and that “there is no god (shen) outside vital force, and there is no vital force outside god” (Yishu 1; 10).

What does Cheng Hao precisely mean by principle, which is intangible and does not have sound or smell? Although translated here as “principle” according to convention, li for Cheng Hao is not a reified entity as the common essence shared by all things or universal law governing these things or inherent principle followed by these things or patterns exhibited by these things. Li as used by Cheng is a verb referring to activity, not a noun referring to thing. For example, he says that “the cold in the winter and the hot in the summer are [vital forces] yin and yang; yet the movement and change [of vital forces] is god” (Yihsu 11; 121). Since god for Cheng means the same as li, li is here understood as the movement and change of vital forces and things constituted by vital forces. Since things and li are inseparable, as li is understood as movement and change, all things are things that move and change, while movement and change are always movement and change of things. Things are tangible, have smell, and make sound, but their movement and change is intangible and does not have sound or smell. We can never perceive things’ activities, although we can perceive things that act. For example we can perceive a moving car, but we cannot perceive the car’s moving. In Cheng Hao’s view, principle as activity is present not only in natural things but also in human affairs. Thus, illustrating what he means by “nowhere between heaven and earth there is no dao” (Yishu 4; 73), Cheng points out that “in the relation of father and son, to be father and son lies in affection; in the relation of king and minister, to be king and minister lies in seriousness (reverence). From these to being husband and wife, being elder and younger brothers, being friends, there is no activity that is no dao. That is why we cannot be separated from dao even for a second” (Yishu 4; 73-74). Cheng makes it clear that the principle that governs these human relations is such activity as affection and reverence.

However, in what sense can li as activity be regarded as the ontological foundation of things, as activity is not self-existent and has to belong to something? For Cheng Hao, li is a special kind of activity. To explain this, Cheng Hao appeals to the idea of the unceasing life-giving activity (sheng sheng) from the Book of Change. Commenting on the statement that “The unceasing life-giving activity is called change” in the Book of Change, Cheng Hao argues that “it is right in this life-giving activity that li is complete” (Yishu 2a; 33). So li is the kind of activity that gives life. It is indeed in this sense of life-giving activity that Cheng Hao regards dao and tian as identical to li, as he claims that “because of this [the unceasing life-giving activity] tian can be dao. Tian is dao only because it is the life-giving activity” (Yishu 2a; 29). Thus, although life-giving activity is always the life-giving activity of ten thousand things, ten thousand things cannot come into being without the life-giving activity. It is in this sense that the life-giving activity of ten thousand things becomes ontologically prior to ten thousand things that have the life-giving activity. This is quite similar to Martin Heidegger’s ontology of Being: while Being is always the Being of beings, beings are being because of their Being.

3. Goodness of Human Nature

Since for Cheng Hao, human nature (xing) is nothing but principle destined in human beings, and since principle is nothing but life-giving activity (sheng), this life-giving activity is also human nature. It is in this sense that he speaks approvingly of Gaozi’s sheng zhi wei xing, a view criticized in the Mencius. By sheng zhi wei xing, Gaozi means that “what one is born with is nature.” Mencius criticizes this view and argues that human nature is what distinguishes human beings from non-human beings, which according to him is the beginning of four cardinal Confucian virtues: humanity (ren), rightness (yi), propriety (li), and wisdom (zhi). When Cheng Hao claims that what Gaozi says is indeed correct, however, he does not mean to disagree with Mencius. On the contrary, he endorses Mencius’ view in the same passage where he approves Gaozi’s view. This is because Cheng Hao has a very different understanding of sheng in sheng zhi wei xing than Gaozi does. For Gaozi, sheng means what one is born with, while for Cheng Hao it is the life-giving activity, which is the ultimate reality of the universe. So for Gaozi the phrase says that what humans are born with is human nature, but for Cheng Hao it means that the life-giving activity is human nature. This is most clear because Cheng Hao quotes this saying of Gaozi together with the statement from the Book of Change that “the greatest virtue of heaven and earth is the life-giving activity” and then explains this statement in his own words: “the most spectacular aspect of things is their atmosphere of life-giving activity” (Yishu 11; 120).

To understand human nature as the life-giving activity, it is important to see the actual content of human nature for Cheng Hao: “These five, humanity, rightness, propriety, wisdom, and faithfulness, are human nature. Humanity is like the complete body and the other four are like the four limbs” (Yishu 2a; 14). So his view of human nature is basically the same as Mencius, except he adds the fifth component, faithfulness. Since these five components of human nature are also five cardinal Confucian virtues, Cheng Hao talks about “virtuous human nature” (dexing) and “virtue of human nature” (xing zhi de): “ ‘virtuous nature’ indicates the worthiness of nature and so means the same thing as goodness of human nature. ‘Virtues of human nature’ refers to what human nature possesses” (Yishu 11; 125). To illustrate the goodness of human nature, Cheng Hao highlights the importance of humanity (ren), regarding it as the complete human nature that includes the other four components, because “rightness, propriety, wisdom, and faithfulness are all humanity” (2a; 16-17). For Cheng, humanity is precisely the life-giving activity. In the same passage in which he affirms Gaozi’s saying, after stating that “the atmosphere of life-giving activity is most spectacular,” Cheng Hao further makes it clear that it is humanity that continues the life-giving activity: “ ‘what is great and originating becomes (in humans) the first and chief (quality of goodness).’ This quality is known as humanity” (Yishu 11; 120). Thus, for Cheng Hao, humanity is not merely a human virtue. It is actually no different from the life-giving activity. Just like heaven, dao, god, and lord, it is indistinguishable from principle (li) as the ultimate reality.

Understood as life-giving activity, it becomes clear why human nature, which can be illustrated by humanity (as it includes other components of human nature) is good. In Cheng Hao’s view, this sense of life-giving activity that humanity (ren) has is best explained by doctors when they refer to a person who is numb as lacking ren: “doctors regard a person as not-ren when the person cannot feel pain and itch; we regard a person as lacking humanity when the person does not know, is not conscious of, and cannot recognize rightness and principle. This is the best analogy” (Yishu 2a; 33). A person whose hands and feet are numb cannot even feel the pain of oneself, to say nothing of that of others. In contrast, “a person of humanity will be in one body with ten thousand things” (2a; 15). This means that a person of humanity, a person who is not numb (lacking ren) is sensitive to the pain of other beings, not only human beings but also non-human beings, in the same way that one is sensitive to one’s own pain.

A difficulty in understanding Cheng Hao’s view of human nature is that he sometimes seems to think that not only good but also evil can be attributed to human nature and principle. About the former, he states that, “while goodness indeed belongs to human nature, it cannot be said that evil does not belong to human nature” (Yishu 1; 10). About the latter, he says that “it is tian li that there are both good and evil in the world” (Yishu 2a; 14) and “that some things are good and some things are evil” (2b; 17). In both cases, however, Cheng Hao does not mean that evil belongs to human nature or principle in the same way as good belongs to human nature, and so what he says in these passages is not inconsistent with his view of human nature as good. As for evil belonging to human nature, Cheng Hao uses the analogy of water. Just as we cannot say muddy water is not water, so we cannot say the distorted human nature is not human nature. Here Cheng Hao makes it clear that water is originally clear, and human nature is originally good. That is why in the same passage in which he says that evil cannot be said not to belong to human nature, he emphasizes that Mencius is right in insisting that human nature is good. So goodness inherently belongs to human nature, while evil is only externally attached to and therefore can be detached from human nature, just as clearness inherently belongs to water, while mud is only externally mixed in and therefore can be eliminated from water (Yishu 1; 10-11). In the two passages in which Cheng Hao states that it is li or tian li that there are both good and evil people, Cheng does not mean that heaven or principle as life-giving activity is both good and evil. In such contexts, Cheng Hao means something different by li and tian li. It does not mean heaven or principle but means something similar to what Descartes sometimes called “natural light.” What he says in these passages is then that it is natural or naturally understandable (tian li) that there are good people and there are bad people. The question then is why it is natural or naturally understandable to have both good people and evil people when human nature is purely good.

4. Origin of Evil

Cheng Hao holds the view that human nature is good and yet thinks it natural that there are both good people and evil people. To explain this, like many other neo-Confucians, Cheng Hao appeals to the distinction between principle and vital force (qi). While the ideas of both principle (li) (to which human nature is identical) and vital force (qi), appeared in earlier Confucian texts, it is in neo-Confucianism that these two become an important pair. In Cheng Hao’s view, “it is not complete to talk about human nature without talking about qi, while it is not illuminating to talk about qi without talking about human nature” (Yishu 6; 81). It is common among neo-Confucians to regard human nature as good and to attribute the origin of evil to the vital force. In this respect Cheng Hao is not an exception. Cheng Hao claims that it is natural that there are good people and evil people precisely because of vital force. Thus, in the same passage in which he uses the analogy of water, after claiming that human nature and vital force cannot be separated from each other, he states that “human life is endowed with vital force, and therefore it is naturally understandable (li) that there are good and evil (people)…. Some people have been good since childhood, and some people have been evil since childhood. This is all because of the vital force they are endowed with” (Yishu 1; 10). Then he uses the analogy of water. Water is the same everywhere, but some water becomes muddy after flowing a short distance, some becomes muddy after flowing a long distance, and some remains clear even when flowing into the sea. The original state of water is clear; whether it remains clear or becomes muddy depends upon the condition of the route it flows. The original state of human nature is good; whether a person remains good or becomes evil depends upon the quality of the vital force the person is endowed with.

There is an apparent problem, however, with this solution to the problem of the origin of evil. Cheng Hao argues that what constitutes human nature is not only present in human beings but also in all ten thousand things. Thus, after explaining the five constant components of human nature – humanity, rightness, propriety, wisdom, and faithfulness – Cheng Hao points out that “all ten thousand things have the same nature, and these five are constant natures” (Yishu 9; 105). Cheng Hao repeatedly claims that ten thousand things form one body. In his view, this is “because all ten thousand things have the same principle”; human beings are born with a complete nature, but “we cannot say other things do not have it” (Yishu 2a; 33). Thus Cheng Hao argues that horses and cows also love their children, because the four beginnings that Mencius talks about are also present in them (Yishu 2b; 54). In other words, in terms of nature, there is no difference between human beings and other beings. The difference between human beings and other beings lies in their ability to extend (tui) the principle destined in ten thousand things (to extend the natural love beyond one’s intimate circle), and the difference in this ability further lies in the kind of vital force they are respectively endowed with. Thus Cheng Hao argues that “Humans can extend the principle, while things cannot because their vital force is muddy” (Yishu 2a; 33). Here, he emphasizes that the vital force that animals are endowed with is not clear. In contrast, “the vital force that human beings are endowed with is most clear, and therefore human beings can become partner [with heaven and earth]” (Yishu 2b; 54). In addition to this distinction between clear and muddy vital forces, Cheng Hao also claims that the vital force that humans are endowed with is balanced (zheng), while the vital force that animals are endowed with is one-sided (pian). After reaffirming that human heart-mind is the same as the heart-mind of animals and plants, he says that “the difference between human beings and other beings is whether the vital force they are respectively endowed with is balanced or one-sided [between yin and yang]. Neither yin alone nor yang alone can give birth to anything. When one-sided, yin and yang give birth to birds, beast, and barbarians; when balanced, yin and yang give birth to humans” (Yishu 1; 4; see also Yishu 11; 122).

Cheng Hao thus makes precisely the same distinction between good people and evil people as he makes between human beings and animals. The apparent problem here would seem to be that evil people would then be indistinguishable from animals since they are both endowed with turbid, one-sided, and mixed vital force, as Cheng Hao does often regard evil people as beasts. However, the problem is rather: since Cheng Hao believes that animals cannot be transformed into human beings because their endowed vital force is turbid, one-sided, and mixed, how can he believe, as he does, that evil humans who are also endowed with such turbid, one-sided, and mixed vital force can be transformed into moral beings and even sages? In other words, what is the difference between evil humans and beasts that makes the difference?

Cheng Hao seems to be aware of this problem, and he attempts to solve it by making the distinction between host vital force (zhu qi) and alien or guest vital force (ke qi). For example, he states that “rightness (yi) and the principle (li) on the one side and the alien vital force on the other often fight against each other. The distinction between superior persons and inferior persons is made according to the degree of the one conquered by another. The more the principle and rightness gain the upper hand…the more the alien vital force is extinguished” (Yishu 1; 4-5). For human beings, the host vital force is the one that is constitutive of human beings, which makes human being a bodily existence, while the guest vital force is constitutive of the environment, in which a human being, as a bodily existence, is born and lives. This distinction between host and alien vital force is equivalent to the one between internal (nei qi) and external vital force (wai qi) that his brother Cheng Yi makes, and therefore the analogy the Cheng Yi uses to explain the latter distinction can assist us in understanding the former distinction. For Cheng Yi, the internal vital force is not mixed with but absorbs nourishment from the external vital force. Then he uses the analogy of fish in water to explain it: “The life of fish is not caused by water. However, only by absorbing nourishment from water can fish live. Human beings live between heaven and earth in the same way as fish live in water. The nourishment humans receive from drinking and food is from the external vital force” (Yishu 15; 165-166).

In this analogy, a fish has both its internal or host vital force, the vital force that it is internally endowed with, which accounts for its corporeal form, and its external or guest vital force, the vital force it is externally endowed with, which provides the environment in which fish can live. This analogy performs the same function as Cheng Hao’s own analogy of water (mentioned above). Water itself is a bodily being with a nature and internal vital force, both of which guarantee its clearness. However, water has to exist in external vital force (river, for example). If this external vital force is also favorable, the water will remain clear, but if it is not favorable, the water will become muddy. In this analogy, water is equivalent to human beings, and “the clearness of water is equivalent to the goodness of human nature” (Yishu 1; 11). Through such an analogy, Cheng Hao attempts to show that, in addition to human nature, humans are endowed both internally with the host vital force, which is constitutive of human body, and externally with the alien vital force, which makes up the natural and social environment in which humans live. Therefore, not only is human nature all good, but the host vital force constitutive of human beings is also pure, clear, and balanced. Neither of the two can account for human evil. However, since human beings are corporeal beings, they must be born to and live in the midst of external vital force, which can be pure or impure. It is the quality of this external or guest vital force, purity or impurity, and the way people deal with it, that distinguishes between good and evil people. If the external vital force is also pure, it will provide the necessary nourishment to the internal vital force and therefore the original good human nature will not be damaged, and people will be good. If the external vital force is turbid and human beings living in it have not developed immunity to it, their internal vital force will be malnourished or even polluted and the original good human nature will be damaged, and people will be evil.

Thus, in Cheng Hao’s view, although both evil people and animals are endowed with muddy, mixed, and one-sided vital force, evil people are endowed with it externally as the necessary environment in which they have to live, while animals are endowed with it internally as constitutive of their bodily existence. In other words, such muddy, mixed, and one-sided vital force is the external guest vital force for human beings but is the internal host vital force for animals. Since the host vital force constitutive of animals – the vital force that makes animals animals – is muddy, mixed, and one-sided, animals can never be transformed into moral beings. On the other hand, since the host vital force constitutive of evil people, just as that constitutive of good people, is originally pure, clear, and balanced, but is only later polluted by muddy, mixed, and one-sided alien vital force, they can be made to become good by clearing up the pollution. Here, just as muddy water, when purified, does not enter into a state it has never been in before but simply returns to its original state of clearness, so an evil person, when made good, does not become an entirely new being, but simply returns to its original state of goodness (Yishu 1; 10-11). A return to this original state requires moral cultivation.

5. Moral Cultivation

Cheng Hao’s distinction between the host vital force and guest vital force makes a great contribution to the solution of the problem of the origin of evil. At least this is a step further than simply appealing to the distinction between principle and vital force. Still it is hard to say that it is completely successful, as it seems to attribute the origin of evil entirely to the external environment, which is also suggested by Mencius in his analogies of the growing of wheat (Mencius 6a7) and the Niu Mountain (Mencius 6a8). Some scholars believe such a view is implausible, and even both Cheng Hao and Mencius think that an evil person is also responsible for becoming bad. However, neither of them provides a satisfactory explanation about the internal origin of evil. Perhaps their very idea of the original goodness of human nature prevents such an explanation, just as Xunzi’s idea of the original badness of human nature perhaps prevents him from a satisfactory explanation of the origin of goodness: Xunzi does appeal to the transformative influence of sages and their teaching as a solution to the problem, but then he faces the problem of the origin of sages as their nature, as he claims, is also evil.

Whether Cheng Hao’s solution to the problem of the origin of evil is satisfactory or not, it is undeniable that one can become evil even though his or her nature is good. So Cheng Hao emphasizes the importance of moral cultivation. Since evil occurs when the turbid external vital force pollutes one’s originally clean internal vital force, just as the dust and dirt in the river makes the originally clear water muddy, what is needed is to purify the contaminated internal vital force, just as the turbid water must settle to become clear. This process is called cultivation of the vital force (yang qi) in Mencius. When the internal vital force is cultivated to the utmost, it becomes as clear, bright, pure, and complete as it is in its original state. This is also what Mencius calls “flood-like” vital force (haoran zhi qi), and so Cheng Hao puts a great emphasis on the passage of the Mencius in which Mencius talks about the cultivation of this flood-like vital force (Yishu 11; 117). Cheng Hao claims that “the flood-like vital force is nothing but my own [internally endowed] vital force. When it is cultivated instead of being harmed, it can fill between heaven and earth. Once it is blocked by private desires, however, it will immediately become withered” (Yishu 2a; 20). In other words, Mencius’ flood-like vital force is what everyone is originally internally endowed with, and everyone should cultivate it in case it gets contaminated by the turbid external vital force.

How does one cultivate the flood-like vital force? Cheng Hao claims that it does not come from outside. Rather it results from “consistent moral actions (jiyi)” (Yishu 2a; 29 and Yishu 11; 124). So jiyi becomes the way to cultivate the flood-like vital force. Thus, commenting on the passage in which Mencius talks about the flood-like vital force, Cheng Hao points out that, “cultivated straightly from dao and along the line of principle, it fills up between heaven and earth. [Mencius says that] ‘it is to be accompanied with rightness and dao,’ which means that it takes rightness as its master and never diverts from dao. [Mencius says that] ‘This is generated by consistent moral actions,’ which means that everything one does is in accordance with rightness” (Yishu 1; 11).

To say that cultivation of vital force consists in consistent moral actions, however, for Cheng Hao, does not mean that one has to exert artificial effort to do what is right, even though one does not have the inclination to do it. For this reason, he repeatedly cites Mencius’ claim that “while you must never let it out of your mind, you must not forcibly help it grow either” (Mencius 2a2). In other words, one has to set one’s mind on moral actions and yet cannot force such actions upon oneself. What is important for Cheng Hao is that, when one engages oneself in moral practices, one is not to regulate one’s action with the principle of rightness, as otherwise one will not be able to feel joy in it. In Cheng Hao’s view, this is a distinction best exemplified by the sage king Shun, who “practices from rightness and humanity” instead of “practicing rightness and humanity” (Yishu 3; 61). In other words, one cannot regard morality as external rules that constrain one’s action but as internal source that inclines one to act naturally, without effort, and at ease.

A person becomes evil because of the turbid external force. However, the turbid force can also make one evil because a person’s will is not firm. Thus another way of moral cultivation is to firm up one’s will (chi zhi). While cultivation of the vital force can help firming up one’s original good will, firming up one’s original good will can also help cultivate the vital force. Thus, referring to Mencius’ view about the relationship between these two, Cheng Hao states that, “for a person whose vital force is yet to be cultivated, the activity of the vital force may move one’s will, and the decision of one’s will may cause the movement of the vital force. However, to a person whose virtue is fulfilled, since the will is already firmed up, the vital force will not be able to change one’s will” (Yishu 1; 11). So in Cheng Hao’s view, to avoid being polluted by turbid vital force, it is important to firm up one’s will: “as soon as one’s will is firmed up, the vital force cannot cause any trouble” (Yishu 2b; 53). On the one hand, if one’s will is not firm, it may be disturbed by violent vital force; on the other hand, if one’s will is firm, the vital force cannot disturb it.

In order to firm up one’s will, Cheng Hao claims that it is most important to live in reverence (ju jing). The primary function of being in reverence is to overcome one’s selfish desires: “As soon as one has selfish desires, [one’s heart-mind] will wither, and the flood-like vital force will be lacking” (Yishu 2a; 29). To be reverent inside is to overcome selfish desires. As soon as these selfish desires are overcome, one will be like a sage, who “is happy with things because they are things one ought to be happy with, and is angry at things because they are things one ought to be angry at. The sage’s being happy or angry is thus according to things and not according to his own likes or dislikes” (Wenji 2; 461). This is because, in Cheng Hao’s view, the inborn virtues of sages and worthies are also complete in everyone’s original nature. Thus when not harmed, one need only practice straightly from the inside. If there is some damage, one must be reverent so that it can be purified and return to its original state (Yishu 1; 1).

These two ways of moral cultivation – cultivation of the vital force (yang qi), which relies upon consistent moral actions (jiyi), and firming up one’s will (chi zhi), which relies upon one’s being reverent (ju jin) – are what the Book of Chang calls “being reverent (jing) so that one’s inner [heart-mind] will be upright and being right (yi) so that one’s external [actions] will be in accord [with principle].” The former is internal and the latter is external. In Cheng Hao’s view, they are also the only ways to become a sage. One of the common features of these two methods is that they both aim at one’s virtues so that a virtuous person takes delight in being virtuous without making forced efforts (Yishu 2a; 20). Thus, just as he emphasizes “being reverent so that the inner will be straightened” (jing yi zhi nei) instead of “using reverence to straighten the inner” (yi jing zhi nei), he emphasizes “being morally right so that one’s external action will be squared” (yi yi fang wai) instead of “using rightness to square one’s external action” (yi yi fang wai) (Yishu 11; 120). (Although these two Chinese phrases appear identical in romanization, they contain different characters, as can be seen from their different translations.) Moreover, while the two ways can be respectively called internal way and external way, Cheng Hao emphasizes that it is important “to combine the inner way and the external way” (Yishu 1; 9). In other words, these two ways are not separate, as if one could practice one without practicing the other.

6. Influence

Han Yu (768-824), an important Tang dynasty Confucian, established a lineage of the Confucian tradition (daotong) from Yao, Shun, Yu, Tang, King Wen, King Wu, Duke of Zhou, Confucius, and Mencius. He claimed that, after Mencius, this lineage was interrupted. Cheng Yi accepted this Confucian daotong and claimed that his brother Cheng Hao was the first one to continue this lineage after Mencius (Wenji 11; 640). While there may be some exaggeration in such a claim, particularly as it is in the tomb inscription he wrote for his own brother, there is also truth in it. According to one widely accepted chronology, there are three epochs of Confucianism: pre-Qin Classical Confucianism, neo-Confucianism in the Song and Ming dynasties, and contemporary Confucianism. In the second stage, as far as neo-Confucianism can be characterized as the learning of principle, Cheng Hao and Cheng Yi can indeed be regarded as its true founders, and their learning, through their numerous students, to a large extent determined the later development of neo-Confucianism. While the two brothers share fundamentally similar views and most of these students learned from both, different students noticed and exaggerated their different emphases and thus developed different schools. Among all their students, Xie Liangzuo (1050-1103) and Yang Shi (1053-1135) are the most distinguished. Yang Shi transmitted Cheng Yi’s teaching through his student Luo Congyan (1072-1135) and the latter’s student Li Tong (1093-1163), to Zhu Xi. The synthesizer of the lixue school of neo-Confucianism, Xie Liangzuo transmitted Cheng Hao’s learning through a few generations of students such as Wang Ping (1082-1153) and Zhang Jiucheng (1092-1159) to Lu Jiuyuan (1139-1193) and eventually to Wang Yangming, the culminating figure of the xinxue school of neo-Confucianism. Sometimes a third school of neo-Confucianism, xingxue (learning of human nature), is identified, whose most important representative is Hu Hong (?-1161). Hu Hong continued the learning of his father, Hu Anguo (1074-1138), who in turn was also influenced by Xie Liangzuo. In this sense, Cheng Hao leaves his mark on all three main schools of neo-Confucianism (all recognized, in Chinese scholarship, as lixue, learning of principle, understood in the broad sense).

7. References and Further Reading

  • Bol, Peter. Neo-Confucianism in History. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Asia Center, 2008.
    • There are scattered discussions of Cheng Hao throughout the book.
  • Chan, Wing-tsit. A Source Book in Chinese Philosophy. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1963.
    • Chapter 31 is the most extensive English translation of selected sayings and writings by Cheng Hao.
  • Chang, Carsun. The Development of Neo-Confucianism, vol. 1. New Haven, Conn.: College and University Press, 1957.
    • Chapter 9 is devoted to Cheng Hao.
  • Cheng, Hao & Cheng, Yi. Collected Works of the Two Chengs (Er Cheng Ji). Beijing: Zhonghua Shuju, 1988.
    • A collection of the works and sayings of Cheng Hao and Cheng Yi.
  • Fung, Yu-lan (Feng, Yulan). A History of Chinese Philosophy. Vol. II. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1953.
    • Chapter XII, Section 2, is a combined study of Cheng Hao and Cheng Yi.
  • Graham, A.C. Two Chinese Philosophers. La Salle, Illinois: Open Court, 1992.
    • The only book length study of Cheng Hao and Cheng Yi in English.
  • Hon, Tze-ki. “Cheng Hao.” In A. S. Cua, ed., Encyclopedia of Chinese Philosophy. New York: Routledge, 2003.
    • A full length article on Cheng Hao’s philosophy.
  • Hsu, Fu-kuan. “Chu Hsi and Cheng Brothers.” In Wing-tsit Chan, ed., Chu Hsi and Neo-Confucianism. Honolulu: University of Hawaii, 1986.
    • A study of the similarity and difference between Zhu Xi and the Cheng brothers.
  • Huang, Siu-chi. Essentials of Neo-Confucianism: Eight Major Philosophers of the Song and Ming Periods. Westport, Conn.: Greenwood Press, 1999.
    • One chapter is devoted to a philosophical study of Cheng Hao.
  • Huang, Yong. “Confucian Love and Global Ethics: How the Cheng Brothers Would Help Respond to Christian Criticisms.” Asian Philosophy 15/1 (2005): 35-60.
    • A discussion of the contemporary significance of the Cheng brothers’ interpretation of love with distinction.
  • Huang, Yong. “The Cheng Brothers’ Onto-Theological Articulation of Confucian Values.” Asian Philosophy 17/3 (2007): 187-211.
    • An interpretation of the Cheng brothers’ li as life-giving activity.
  • Huang, Yong. “Neo-Confucian Political Philosophy: The Cheng Brothers on Li (Propriety) as Political, Psychological, and Metaphysical.” Journal of Chinese Philosophy 34/2 (2007): 217-239.
    • An exposition of the Cheng brothers’ li as rules of action, as one’s inner feeling, and as human nature.
  • Huang, Yong. “Why Be Moral? The Cheng Brothers’ Neo-Confucian Answer.” Journal of Religious Ethics 36/2 (2008): 321-353.
    • A discussion of the Cheng brothers’ conception of human nature as a response to the question of why be moral.
  • Wong, Wai-ying. “The Status of li in the Cheng Brothers’ Philosophy.” Dao: A Journal of Comparative Philosophy 3/1 (2003): 109-119.
    • An important study of the Cheng brothers’ conception of propriety.
  • Wong, Wai-ying. “Morally Bad in the Philosophy of the Cheng Brothers.” Journal of Chinese Philosophy 36/1 (2009): 157-176.
    • A good discussion of the Cheng brothers’ view of evil.

Author Information

Yong Huang
Kutztown University of Pennsylvania
U. S. A.

Plato (427—347 B.C.E.)

platoPlato is one of the world's best known and most widely read and studied philosophers. He was the student of Socrates and the teacher of Aristotle, and he wrote in the middle of the fourth century B.C.E. in ancient Greece. Though influenced primarily by Socrates, to the extent that Socrates is usually the main character in many of Plato's writings, he was also influenced by Heraclitus, Parmenides, and the Pythagoreans.

There are varying degrees of controversy over which of Plato's works are authentic, and in what order they were written, due to their antiquity and the manner of their preservation through time. Nonetheless, his earliest works are generally regarded as the most reliable of the ancient sources on Socrates, and the character Socrates that we know through these writings is considered to be one of the greatest of the ancient philosophers.

Plato's middle to later works, including his most famous work, the Republic, are generally regarded as providing Plato's own philosophy, where the main character in effect speaks for Plato himself. These works blend ethics, political philosophy, moral psychology, epistemology, and metaphysics into an interconnected and systematic philosophy. It is most of all from Plato that we get the theory of Forms, according to which the world we know through the senses is only an imitation of the pure, eternal, and unchanging world of the Forms. Plato's works also contain the origins of the familiar complaint that the arts work by inflaming the passions, and are mere illusions. We also are introduced to the ideal of "Platonic love:" Plato saw love as motivated by a longing for the highest Form of beauty—The Beautiful Itself, and love as the motivational power through which the highest of achievements are possible. Because they tended to distract us into accepting less than our highest potentials, however, Plato mistrusted and generally advised against physical expressions of love.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
    1. Birth
    2. Family
    3. Early Travels and the Founding of the Academy
    4. Later Trips to Sicily and Death
  2. Influences on Plato
    1. Heraclitus
    2. Parmenides and Zeno
    3. The Pythagoreans
    4. Socrates
  3. Plato's Writings
    1. Plato's Dialogues and the Historical Socrates
    2. Dating Plato's Dialogues
    3. Transmission of Plato's Works
  4. Other Works Attributed to Plato
    1. Spuria
    2. Epigrams
    3. Dubia
  5. The Early Dialogues
    1. Historical Accuracy
    2. Plato's Characterization of Socrates
    3. Ethical Positions in the Early Dialogues
    4. Psychological Positions in the Early Dialogues
    5. Religious Positions in the Early Dialogues
    6. Methodological and Epistemological Positions in the Early Dialogues
  6. The Middle Dialogues
    1. Differences between the Early and Middle Dialogues
    2. The Theory of Forms
    3. Immortality and Reincarnation
    4. Moral Psychology
    5. Critique of the Arts
    6. Platonic Love
  7. Late Transitional and Late Dialogues
    1. Philosophical Methodology
    2. Critique of the Earlier Theory of Forms
    3. The Myth of Atlantis
    4. The Creation of the Universe
    5. The Laws
  8. References and Further Reading
    1. Greek Texts
    2. Translations Into English
    3. Plato's Socrates and the Historical Socrates
    4. Socrates and Plato's Early Period Dialogues
    5. General Books on Plato

1. Biography

a. Birth

It is widely accepted that Plato, the Athenian philosopher, was born in 428-7 B.C.E and died at the age of eighty or eighty-one at 348-7 B.C.E. These dates, however, are not entirely certain, for according to Diogenes Laertius (D.L.), following Apollodorus' chronology, Plato was born the year Pericles died, was six years younger than Isocrates, and died at the age of eighty-four (D.L. 3.2-3.3). If Plato's date of death is correct in Apollodorus' version, Plato would have been born in 430 or 431. Diogenes' claim that Plato was born the year Pericles died would put his birth in 429. Later (at 3.6), Diogenes says that Plato was twenty-eight when Socrates was put to death (in 399), which would, again, put his year of birth at 427. In spite of the confusion, the dates of Plato's life we gave above, which are based upon Eratosthenes' calculations, have traditionally been accepted as accurate.

b. Family

Little can be known about Plato's early life. According to Diogenes, whose testimony is notoriously unreliable, Plato's parents were Ariston and Perictione (or Potone—see D. L. 3.1). Both sides of the family claimed to trace their ancestry back to Poseidon (D.L. 3.1). Diogenes' report that Plato's birth was the result of Ariston's rape of Perictione (D.L. 3.1) is a good example of the unconfirmed gossip in which Diogenes so often indulges. We can be confident that Plato also had two older brothers, Glaucon and Adeimantus, and a sister, Potone, by the same parents (see D.L. 3.4). (W. K. C. Guthrie, A History of Greek Philosophy, vol. 4, 10 n. 4 argues plausibly that Glaucon and Adeimantus were Plato's older siblings.) After Ariston's death, Plato's mother married her uncle, Pyrilampes (in Plato's Charmides, we are told that Pyrilampes was Charmides' uncle, and Charmides was Plato's mother's brother), with whom she had another son, Antiphon, Plato's half-brother (see Plato, Parmenides 126a-b).

Plato came from one of the wealthiest and most politically active families in Athens. Their political activities, however, are not seen as laudable ones by historians. One of Plato's uncles (Charmides) was a member of the notorious "Thirty Tyrants," who overthrew the Athenian democracy in 404 B.C.E. Charmides' own uncle, Critias, was the leader of the Thirty. Plato's relatives were not exclusively associated with the oligarchic faction in Athens, however. His stepfather Pyrilampes was said to have been a close associate of Pericles, when he was the leader of the democratic faction.

Plato's actual given name was apparently Aristocles, after his grandfather. "Plato" seems to have started as a nickname (for platos, or "broad"), perhaps first given to him by his wrestling teacher for his physique, or for the breadth of his style, or even the breadth of his forehead (all given in D.L. 3.4). Although the name Aristocles was still given as Plato's name on one of the two epitaphs on his tomb (see D.L. 3.43), history knows him as Plato.

c. Early Travels and the Founding of the Academy

When Socrates died, Plato left Athens, staying first in Megara, but then going on to several other places, including perhaps Cyrene, Italy, Sicily, and even Egypt. Strabo (17.29) claims that he was shown where Plato lived when he visited Heliopolis in Egypt. Plato occasionally mentions Egypt in his works, but not in ways that reveal much of any consequence (see, for examples, Phaedrus 274c-275b; Philebus 19b).

Better evidence may be found for his visits to Italy and Sicily, especially in the Seventh Letter. According to the account given there, Plato first went to Italy and Sicily when he was "about forty" (324a). While he stayed in Syracuse, he became the instructor to Dion, brother-in-law of the tyrant Dionysius I. According to doubtful stories from later antiquity, Dionysius became annoyed with Plato at some point during this visit, and arranged to have the philosopher sold into slavery (Diod. 15.7; Plut. Dion 5; D.L. 3.19-21).

In any event, Plato returned to Athens and founded a school, known as the Academy. (This is where we get our word, "academic." The Academy got its name from its location, a grove of trees sacred to the hero Academus—or Hecademus [see D.L. 3.7]—a mile or so outside the Athenian walls; the site can still be visited in modern Athens, but visitors will find it depressingly void of interesting monuments or features.) Except for two more trips to Sicily, the Academy seems to have been Plato's home base for the remainder of his life.

d. Later Trips to Sicily and Death

The first of Plato's remaining two Sicilian adventures came after Dionysius I died and his young son, Dionysius II, ascended to the throne. His uncle/brother-in-law Dion persuaded the young tyrant to invite Plato to come to help him become a philosopher-ruler of the sort described in the Republic. Although the philosopher (now in his sixties) was not entirely persuaded of this possibility (Seventh Letter 328b-c), he agreed to go. This trip, like the last one, however, did not go well at all. Within months, the younger Dionysius had Dion sent into exile for sedition (Seventh Letter 329c, Third Letter 316c-d), and Plato became effectively under house arrest as the "personal guest" of the dictator (Seventh Letter 329c-330b).

Plato eventually managed to gain the tyrant's permission to return to Athens (Seventh Letter 338a), and he and Dion were reunited at the Academy (Plut. Dion 17). Dionysius agreed that "after the war" (Seventh Letter 338a; perhaps the Lucanian War in 365 B.C.E.), he would invite Plato and Dion back to Syracuse (Third Letter 316e-317a, Seventh Letter 338a-b). Dion and Plato stayed in Athens for the next four years (c. 365-361 B.C.E.). Dionysius then summoned Plato, but wished for Dion to wait a while longer. Dion accepted the condition and encouraged Plato to go immediately anyway (Third Letter 317a-b, Seventh Letter 338b-c), but Plato refused the invitation, much to the consternation of both Syracusans (Third Letter 317a, Seventh Letter 338c). Hardly a year had passed, however, before Dionysius sent a ship, with one of Plato's Pythagorean friends (Archedemus, an associate of Archytas—see Seventh Letter 339a-b and next section) on board begging Plato to return to Syracuse. Partly because of his friend Dion's enthusiasm for the plan, Plato departed one more time to Syracuse. Once again, however, things in Syracuse were not at all to Plato's liking. Dionysius once again effectively imprisoned Plato in Syracuse, and the latter was only able to escape again with help from his Tarentine friends ( Seventh Letter 350a-b).

Dion subsequently gathered an army of mercenaries and invaded his own homeland. But his success was short-lived: he was assassinated and Sicily was reduced to chaos. Plato, perhaps now completely disgusted with politics, returned to his beloved Academy, where he lived out the last thirteen years of his life. According to Diogenes, Plato was buried at the school he founded (D.L. 3.41). His grave, however, has not yet been discovered by archeological investigations.

2. Influences on Plato

a. Heraclitus

Aristotle and Diogenes agree that Plato had some early association with either the philosophy of Heraclitus of Ephesus, or with one or more of that philosopher's followers (see Aristotle Metaph. 987a32, D.L. 3.4-3.5). The effects of this influence can perhaps be seen in the mature Plato's conception of the sensible world as ceaselessly changing.

b. Parmenides and Zeno

There can be no doubt that Plato was also strongly influenced by Parmenides and Zeno (both of Elea), in Plato's theory of the Forms, which are plainly intended to satisfy the Parmenidean requirement of metaphysical unity and stability in knowable reality. Parmenides and Zeno also appear as characters in his dialogue, the Parmenides. Diogenes Laertius also notes other important influences:

He mixed together in his works the arguments of Heracleitus, the Pythagoreans, and Socrates. Regarding the sensibles, he borrows from Heraclitus; regarding the intelligibles, from Pythagoras; and regarding politics, from Socrates. (D.L. 3.8)

A little later, Diogenes makes a series of comparisons intended to show how much Plato owed to the comic poet, Epicharmus (3.9-3.17).

c. The Pythagoreans

Diogenes Laertius (3.6) claims that Plato visited several Pythagoreans in Southern Italy (one of whom, Theodorus, is also mentioned as a friend to Socrates in Plato's Theaetetus). In the Seventh Letter, we learn that Plato was a friend of Archytas of Tarentum, a well-known Pythagorean statesman and thinker (see 339d-e), and in the Phaedo, Plato has Echecrates, another Pythagorean, in the group around Socrates on his final day in prison. Plato's Pythagorean influences seem especially evident in his fascination with mathematics, and in some of his political ideals (see Plato's political philosophy), expressed in various ways in several dialogues.

d. Socrates

Nonetheless, it is plain that no influence on Plato was greater than that of Socrates. This is evident not only in many of the doctrines and arguments we find in Plato's dialogues, but perhaps most obviously in Plato's choice of Socrates as the main character in most of his works. According to the Seventh Letter, Plato counted Socrates "the justest man alive" (324e). According to Diogenes Laertius, the respect was mutual (3.5).

3. Plato's Writings

a. Plato's Dialogues and the Historical Socrates

Supposedly possessed of outstanding intellectual and artistic ability even from his youth, according to Diogenes, Plato began his career as a writer of tragedies, but hearing Socrates talk, he wholly abandoned that path, and even burned a tragedy he had hoped to enter in a dramatic competition (D.L. 3.5). Whether or not any of these stories is true, there can be no question of Plato's mastery of dialogue, characterization, and dramatic context. He may, indeed, have written some epigrams; of the surviving epigrams attributed to him in antiquity, some may be genuine.

Plato was not the only writer of dialogues in which Socrates appears as a principal character and speaker. Others, including Alexamenos of Teos (Aristotle Poetics 1447b11; De Poetis fr. 3 Ross [=Rose2 72]), Aeschines (D.L. 2.60-63, 3.36, Plato Apology 33e), Antisthenes (D.L. 3.35, 6; Plato, Phaedo 59b; Xenophon, Memorabilia 2.4.5, 3.2.17), Aristippus (D.L. 2.65-104, 3.36, Plato Phaedo 59c), Eucleides (D.L. 2.106-112), Phaedo (D.L. 2.105; Plato, Phaedo passim), Simon (D.L. 122-124), and especially Xenophon (see D.L. 2.48-59, 3.34), were also well-known "Socratics" who composed such works. A recent study of these, by Charles H. Kahn (1996, 1-35), concludes that the very existence of the genre—and all of the conflicting images of Socrates we find given by the various authors—shows that we cannot trust as historically reliable any of the accounts of Socrates given in antiquity, including those given by Plato.

But it is one thing to claim that Plato was not the only one to write Socratic dialogues, and quite another to hold that Plato was only following the rules of some genre of writings in his own work. Such a claim, at any rate, is hardly established simply by the existence of these other writers and their writings. We may still wish to ask whether Plato's own use of Socrates as his main character has anything at all to do with the historical Socrates. The question has led to a number of seemingly irresolvable scholarly disputes. At least one important ancient source, Aristotle, suggests that at least some of the doctrines Plato puts into the mouth of the "Socrates" of the "early" or "Socrates" dialogues are the very ones espoused by the historical Socrates. Because Aristotle has no reason not to be truthful about this issue, many scholars believe that his testimony provides a solid basis for distinguishing the "Socrates" of the "early" dialogues from the character by that name in Plato's supposedly later works, whose views and arguments Aristotle suggests are Plato's own.

b. Dating Plato's Dialogues

One way to approach this issue has been to find some way to arrange the dialogues into at least relative dates. It has frequently been assumed that if we can establish a relative chronology for when Plato wrote each of the dialogues, we can provide some objective test for the claim that Plato represented Socrates more accurately in the earlier dialogues, and less accurately in the later dialogues.

In antiquity, the ordering of Plato's dialogues was given entirely along thematic lines. The best reports of these orderings (see Diogenes Laertius' discussion at 3.56-62) included many works whose authenticity is now either disputed or unanimously rejected. The uncontroversial internal and external historical evidence for a chronological ordering is relatively slight. Aristotle (Politics 2.6.1264b24-27), Diogenes Laertius (3.37), and Olympiodorus (Prol. 6.24) state that Plato wrote the Laws after the Republic. Internal references in the Sophist (217a) and the Statesman (also known as the Politicus; 257a, 258b) show the Statesman to come after the Sophist. The Timaeus (17b-19b) may refer to Republic as coming before it, and more clearly mentions the Critias as following it (27a). Similarly, internal references in the Sophist (216a, 217c) and the Theaetetus (183e) may be thought to show the intended order of three dialogues: Parmenides, Theaetetus, and Sophist. Even so, it does not follow that these dialogues were actually written in that order. At Theaetetus 143c, Plato announces through his characters that he will abandon the somewhat cumbersome dialogue form that is employed in his other writings. Since the form does not appear in a number of other writings, it is reasonable to infer that those in which it does not appear were written after the Theaetetus.

Scholars have sought to augment this fairly scant evidence by employing different methods of ordering the remaining dialogues. One such method is that of stylometry, by which various aspects of Plato's diction in each dialogue are measured against their uses and frequencies in other dialogues. Originally done by laborious study by individuals, stylometry can now be done more efficiently with assistance by computers. Another, even more popular, way to sort and group the dialogues is what is called "content analysis," which works by finding and enumerating apparent commonalities or differences in the philosophical style and content of the various dialogues. Neither of these general approaches has commanded unanimous assent among scholars, and it is unlikely that debates about this topic can ever be put entirely to rest. Nonetheless, most recent scholarship seems to assume that Plato's dialogues can be sorted into different groups, and it is not unusual for books and articles on the philosophy of Socrates to state that by "Socrates" they mean to refer to the character in Plato's "early" or Socratic dialogues, as if this Socrates was as close to the historical Socrates as we are likely to get. (We have more to say on this subject in the next section.) Perhaps the most thorough examination of this sort can be found in Gregory Vlastos's, Socrates: Ironist and Moral Philosopher (Cambridge and Cornell, 1991, chapters 2-4), where ten significant differences between the "Socrates" of Plato's "early" dialogues and the character by that name in the later dialogues are noted. Our own view of the probable dates and groups of dialogues, which to some extent combine the results of stylometry and content analysis, is as follows (all lists but the last in alphabetical order):

(All after the death of Socrates, but before Plato's first trip to Sicily in 387 B.C.E.):

Apology, Charmides, Crito, Euthydemus, Euthyphro, Gorgias, Hippias Major, Hippias Minor, Ion, Laches, Lysis, Protagoras, Republic Bk. I.

(Either at the end of the early group or at the beginning of the middle group, c. 387-380 B.C.E.):

Cratylus, Menexenus, Meno

(c. 380-360 B.C.E.)

Phaedo, Republic Bks. II-X, Symposium

(Either at the end of the middle group, or the beginning of the late group, c. 360-355 B.C.E.)

Parmenides, Theaetetus, Phaedrus

(c. 355-347 B.C.E.; possibly in chronological order)

Sophist, Statesman, Philebus, Timaeus, Critias, Laws

c. Transmission of Plato's Works

Except for the Timaeus, all of Plato's works were lost to the Western world until medieval times, preserved only by Moslem scholars in the Middle East. In 1578 Henri Estienne (whose Latinized name was Stephanus) published an edition of the dialogues in which each page of the text is separated into five sections (labeled a, b, c, d, and e). The standard style of citation for Platonic texts includes the name of the text, followed by Stephanus page and section numbers (e.g. Republic 511d). Scholars sometimes also add numbers after the Stephanus section letters, which refer to line numbers within the Stephanus sections in the standard Greek edition of the dialogues, the Oxford Classical texts.

4. Other Works Attributed to Plato

a. Spuria

Several other works, including thirteen letters and eighteen epigrams, have been attributed to Plato. These other works are generally called the spuria and the dubia. The spuria were collected among the works of Plato but suspected as frauds even in antiquity. The dubia are those presumed authentic in later antiquity, but which have more recently been doubted.

Ten of the spuria are mentioned by Diogenes Laertius at 3.62. Five of these are no longer extant: the Midon or Horse-breeder, Phaeacians, Chelidon, Seventh Day, and Epimenides. Five others do exist: the Halcyon, Axiochus, Demodocus, Eryxias, and Sisyphus. To the ten Diogenes Laertius lists, we may uncontroversially add On Justice, On Virtue, and the Definitions, which was included in the medieval manuscripts of Plato's work, but not mentioned in antiquity.

Works whose authenticity was also doubted in antiquity include the Second Alcibiades (or Alcibiades II), Epinomis, Hipparchus, and Rival Lovers (also known as either Rivals or Lovers), and these are sometimes defended as authentic today. If any are of these are authentic, the Epinomis would be in the late group, and the others would go with the early or early transitional groups.

b. Epigrams

Seventeen or eighteen epigrams (poems appropriate to funerary monuments or other dedications) are also attributed to Plato by various ancient authors. Most of these are almost certainly not by Plato, but some few may be authentic. Of the ones that could be authentic (Cooper 1997, 1742 names 1, 2, 7, and especially 3 as possibly authentic), one (1) is a love poem dedicated to a student of astronomy, perhaps at the Academy, another (2) appears to be a funerary inscription for that same student, another (3) is a funerary inscription for Plato's Syracusan friend, Dion (in which the author confesses that Dion "maddened my heart with erôs"), and the last (7) is a love poem to a young woman or girl. None appear to provide anything of great philosophical interest.

c. Dubia

The dubia present special risks to scholars: On the one hand, any decision not to include them among the authentic dialogues creates the risk of losing valuable evidence for Plato's (or perhaps Socrates') philosophy; on the other hand, any decision to include them creates the risk of obfuscating the correct view of Plato's (or Socrates') philosophy, by including non-Platonic (or non-Socratic) elements within that philosophy. The dubia include the First Alcibiades (or Alcibiades I), Minos, and Theages, all of which, if authentic, would probably go with the early or early transitional groups, the Cleitophon, which might be early, early transitional, or middle, and the letters, of which the Seventh seems the best candidate for authenticity. Some scholars have also suggested the possibility that the Third may also be genuine. If any are authentic, the letters would appear to be works of the late period, with the possible exception of the Thirteenth Letter, which could be from the middle period.

Nearly all of the dialogues now accepted as genuine have been challenged as inauthentic by some scholar or another. In the 19th Century in particular, scholars often considered arguments for and against the authenticity of dialogues whose authenticity is now only rarely doubted. Of those we listed as authentic, above (in the early group), only the Hippias Major continues occasionally to be listed as inauthentic. The strongest evidence against the authenticity of the Hippias Major is the fact that it is never mentioned in any of the ancient sources. However, relative to how much was actually written in antiquity, so little now remains that our lack of ancient references to this dialogue does not seem to be an adequate reason to doubt its authenticity. In style and content, it seems to most contemporary scholars to fit well with the other Platonic dialogues.

5. The Early Dialogues

a. Historical Accuracy

Although no one thinks that Plato simply recorded the actual words or speeches of Socrates verbatim, the argument has been made that there is nothing in the speeches Socrates makes in the Apology that he could have not uttered at the historical trial. At any rate, it is fairly common for scholars to treat Plato's Apology as the most reliable of the ancient sources on the historical Socrates. The other early dialogues are certainly Plato's own creations. But as we have said, most scholars treat these as representing more or less accurately the philosophy and behavior of the historical Socrates—even if they do not provide literal historical records of actual Socratic conversations. Some of the early dialogues include anachronisms that prove their historical inaccuracy.

It is possible, of course, that the dialogues are all wholly Plato's inventions and have nothing at all to do with the historical Socrates. Contemporary scholars generally endorse one of the following four views about the dialogues and their representation of Socrates:

  1. The Unitarian View:
    This view, more popular early in the 20th Century than it is now, holds that there is but a single philosophy to be found in all of Plato's works (of any period, if such periods can even be identified reliably). There is no reason, according to the Unitarian scholar, ever to talk about "Socratic philosophy" (at least from anything to be found in Plato—everything in Plato's dialogues is Platonic philosophy, according to the Unitarian). One recent version of this view has been argued by Charles H. Kahn (1996). Most later, but still ancient, interpretations of Plato were essentially Unitarian in their approach. Aristotle, however, was a notable exception.
  2. The Literary Atomist View:
    We call this approach the "literary atomist view," because those who propose this view treat each dialogue as a complete literary whole, whose proper interpretation must be achieved without reference to any of Plato's other works. Those who endorse this view reject completely any relevance or validity of sorting or grouping the dialogues into groups, on the ground that any such sorting is of no value to the proper interpretation of any given dialogue. In this view, too, there is no reason to make any distinction between "Socratic philosophy" and "Platonic philosophy." According to the literary atomist, all philosophy to be found in the works of Plato should be attributed only to Plato.
  3. The Developmentalist View:
    According to this view, the most widely held of all of the interpretative approaches, the differences between the early and later dialogues represent developments in Plato's own philosophical and literary career. These may or may not be related to his attempting in any of the dialogues to preserve the memory of the historical Socrates (see approach 4); such differences may only represent changes in Plato's own philosophical views. Developmentalists may generally identify the earlier positions or works as "Socratic" and the later ones "Platonic," but may be agnostic about the relationship of the "Socratic" views and works to the actual historical Socrates.
  4. The Historicist View:
    Perhaps the most common of the Developmentalist positions is the view that the "development" noticeable between the early and later dialogues may be attributed to Plato's attempt, in the early dialogues, to represent the historical Socrates more or less accurately. Later on, however (perhaps because of the development of the genre of "Socratic writings," within which other authors were making no attempt at historical fidelity), Plato began more freely to put his own views into the mouth of the character, "Socrates," in his works. Plato's own student, Aristotle, seems to have understood the dialogues in this way.

Now, some scholars who are skeptical about the entire program of dating the dialogues into chronological groups, and who are thus strictly speaking not historicists (see, for example, Cooper 1997, xii-xvii) nonetheless accept the view that the "early" works are "Socratic" in tone and content. With few exceptions, however, scholars agreed that if we are unable to distinguish any group of dialogues as early or "Socratic," or even if we can distinguish a separate set of "Socratic" works but cannot identify a coherent philosophy within those works, it makes little sense to talk about "the philosophy of historical Socrates" at all. There is just too little (and too little that is at all interesting) to be found that could reliably be attributed to Socrates from any other ancient authors. Any serious philosophical interest in Socrates, then, must be pursued through study of Plato's early or "Socratic" dialogues.

b. Plato's Characterization of Socrates

In the dialogues generally accepted as early (or "Socratic"), the main character is always Socrates. Socrates is represented as extremely agile in question-and-answer, which has come to be known as "the Socratic method of teaching," or "the elenchus" (or elenchos, from the Greek term for refutation), with Socrates nearly always playing the role as questioner, for he claimed to have no wisdom of his own to share with others. Plato's Socrates, in this period, was adept at reducing even the most difficult and recalcitrant interlocutors to confusion and self-contradiction. In the Apology, Socrates explains that the embarrassment he has thus caused to so many of his contemporaries is the result of a Delphic oracle given to Socrates' friend Chaerephon (Apology 21a-23b), according to which no one was wiser than Socrates. As a result of his attempt to discern the true meaning of this oracle, Socrates gained a divinely ordained mission in Athens to expose the false conceit of wisdom. The embarrassment his "investigations" have caused to so many of his contemporaries—which Socrates claims was the root cause of his being brought up on charges (Apology 23c-24b)—is thus no one's fault but his "victims," for having chosen to live "the unexamined life" (see 38a).

The way that Plato's represents Socrates going about his "mission" in Athens provides a plausible explanation both of why the Athenians would have brought him to trial and convicted him in the troubled years after the end of the Peloponnesian War, and also of why Socrates was not really guilty of the charges he faced. Even more importantly, however, Plato's early dialogues provide intriguing arguments and refutations of proposed philosophical positions that interest and challenge philosophical readers. Platonic dialogues continue to be included among the required readings in introductory and advanced philosophy classes, not only for their ready accessibility, but also because they raise many of the most basic problems of philosophy. Unlike most other philosophical works, moreover, Plato frames the discussions he represents in dramatic settings that make the content of these discussions especially compelling. So, for example, in the Crito, we find Socrates discussing the citizen's duty to obey the laws of the state as he awaits his own legally mandated execution in jail, condemned by what he and Crito both agree was a terribly wrong verdict, the result of the most egregious misapplication of the very laws they are discussing. The dramatic features of Plato's works have earned attention even from literary scholars relatively uninterested in philosophy as such. Whatever their value for specifically historical research, therefore, Plato's dialogues will continue to be read and debated by students and scholars, and the Socrates we find in the early or "Socratic" dialogues will continue to be counted among the greatest Western philosophers.

c. Ethical Positions in the Early Dialogues

The philosophical positions most scholars agree can be found directly endorsed or at least suggested in the early or "Socratic" dialogues include the following moral or ethical views:

  • A rejection of retaliation, or the return of harm for harm or evil for evil (Crito 48b-c, 49c-d; Republic I.335a-e);
  • The claim that doing injustice harms one's soul, the thing that is most precious to one, and, hence, that it is better to suffer injustice than to do it (Crito 47d-48a; Gorgias 478c-e, 511c-512b; Republic I.353d-354a);
  • Some form of what is called "eudaimonism," that is, that goodness is to be understood in terms of conduciveness to human happiness, well-being, or flourishing, which may also be understood as "living well," or "doing well" (Crito 48b; Euthydemus 278e, 282a; Republic I. 354a);
  • The view that only virtue is good just by itself; anything else that is good is good only insofar as it serves or is used for or by virtue (Apology 30b; Euthydemus 281d-e);
  • The view that there is some kind of unity among the virtues: In some sense, all of the virtues are the same (Protagoras 329b-333b, 361a-b);
  • The view that the citizen who has agreed to live in a state must always obey the laws of that state, or else persuade the state to change its laws, or leave the state (Crito 51b-c, 52a-d).

d. Psychological Positions in the Early Dialogues

Socrates also appears to argue for, or directly makes a number of related psychological views:

  • All wrongdoing is done in ignorance, for everyone desires only what is good (Protagoras 352a-c; Gorgias 468b; Meno 77e-78b);
  • In some sense, everyone actually believes certain moral principles, even though some may think they do not have such beliefs, and may disavow them in argument (Gorgias 472b, 475e-476a).

e. Religious Positions in the Early Dialogues

In these dialogues, we also find Socrates represented as holding certain religious beliefs, such as:

  • The gods are completely wise and good (Apology 28a; Euthyphro 6a, 15a; Meno 99b-100b);
  • Ever since his childhood (see Apology 31d) Socrates has experienced a certain "divine something" (Apology 31c-d; 40a; Euthyphro 3b; see also Phaedrus 242b), which consists in a "voice" (Apology 31d; see also Phaedrus 242c), or "sign" (Apology 40c, 41d; Euthydemus 272e; see also Republic VI.496c; Phaedrus 242b) that opposes him when he is about to do something wrong (Apology 40a, 40c);
  • Various forms of divination can allow human beings to come to recognize the will of the gods (Apology 21a-23b, 33c);
  • Poets and rhapsodes are able to write and do the wonderful things they write and do, not from knowledge or expertise, but from some kind of divine inspiration. The same canbe said of diviners and seers, although they do seem to have some kind of expertise—perhaps only some technique by which to put them in a state of appropriate receptivity to the divine (Apology 22b-c; Laches 198e-199a; Ion 533d-536a, 538d-e; Meno 99c);
  • No one really knows what happens after death, but it is reasonable to think that death is not an evil; there may be an afterlife, in which the souls of the good are rewarded, and the souls of the wicked are punished (Apology 40c-41c; Crito 54b-c; Gorgias 523a-527a).

f. Methodological and Epistemological Positions in the Early Dialogues

In addition, Plato's Socrates in the early dialogues may plausibly be regarded as having certain methodological or epistemological convictions, including:

  • Definitional knowledge of ethical terms is at least a necessary condition of reliable judging of specific instances of the values they name (Euthyphro 4e-5d, 6e; Laches 189e-190b; Lysis 223b; Greater Hippias 304d-e; Meno 71a-b, 100b; Republic I.354b-c);
  • A mere list of examples of some ethical value—even if all are authentic cases of that value—would never provide an adequate analysis of what the value is, nor would it provide an adequate definition of the value term that refers to the value. Proper definitions must state what is common to all examples of the value (Euthyphro 6d-e; Meno 72c-d);
  • Those with expert knowledge or wisdom on a given subject do not err in their judgments on that subject (Euthyphro 4e-5a; Euthydemus 279d-280b), go about their business in their area of expertise in a rational and regular way (Gorgias 503e-504b), and can teach and explain their subject (Gorgias 465a, 500e-501b, 514a-b; Laches 185b, 185e, 1889e-190b); Protagoras 319b-c).

6. The Middle Dialogues

a. Differences between the Early and Middle Dialogues

Scholarly attempts to provide relative chronological orderings of the early transitional and middle dialogues are problematical because all agree that the main dialogue of the middle period, the Republic, has several features that make dating it precisely especially difficult. As we have already said, many scholars count the first book of the Republic as among the early group of dialogues. But those who read the entire Republic will also see that the first book also provides a natural and effective introduction to the remaining books of the work. A recent study by Debra Nails ("The Dramatic Date of Plato's Republic," The Classical Journal 93.4, 1998, 383-396) notes several anachronisms that suggest that the process of writing (and perhaps re-editing) the work may have continued over a very long period. If this central work of the period is difficult to place into a specific context, there can be no great assurance in positioning any other works relative to this one.

Nonetheless, it does not take especially careful study of the transitional and middle period dialogues to notice clear differences in style and philosophical content from the early dialogues. The most obvious change is the way in which Plato seems to characterize Socrates: In the early dialogues, we find Socrates simply asking questions, exposing his interlocutors' confusions, all the while professing his own inability to shed any positive light on the subject, whereas in the middle period dialogues, Socrates suddenly emerges as a kind of positive expert, willing to affirm and defend his own theories about many important subjects. In the early dialogues, moreover, Socrates discusses mainly ethical subjects with his interlocutors—with some related religious, methodological, and epistemological views scattered within the primarily ethical discussions. In the middle period, Plato's Socrates' interests expand outward into nearly every area of inquiry known to humankind. The philosophical positions Socrates advances in these dialogues are vastly more systematical, including broad theoretical inquiries into the connections between language and reality (in the Cratylus), knowledge and explanation (in the Phaedo and Republic, Books V-VII). Unlike the Socrates of the early period, who was the "wisest of men" only because he recognized the full extent of his own ignorance, the Socrates of the middle period acknowledges the possibility of infallible human knowledge (especially in the famous similes of light, the simile of the sun and good and the simile of the divided line in Book VI and the parable of the cave in Book VII of the Republic), and this becomes possible in virtue of a special sort of cognitive contact with the Forms or Ideas (eidê ), which exist in a supra-sensible realm available only to thought. This theory of Forms, introduced and explained in various contexts in each of the middle period dialogues, is perhaps the single best-known and most definitive aspect of what has come to be known as Platonism.

b. The Theory of Forms

In many of his dialogues, Plato mentions supra-sensible entities he calls "Forms" (or "Ideas"). So, for example, in the Phaedo, we are told that particular sensible equal things—for example, equal sticks or stones (see Phaedo 74a-75d)—are equal because of their "participation" or "sharing" in the character of the Form of Equality, which is absolutely, changelessly, perfectly, and essentially equal. Plato sometimes characterizes this participation in the Form as a kind of imaging, or approximation of the Form. The same may be said of the many things that are greater or smaller and the Forms of Great and Small (Phaedo 75c-d), or the many tall things and the Form of Tall (Phaedo 100e), or the many beautiful things and the Form of Beauty (Phaedo 75c-d, Symposium 211e, Republic V.476c). When Plato writes about instances of Forms "approximating" Forms, it is easy to infer that, for Plato, Forms are exemplars. If so, Plato believes that The Form of Beauty is perfect beauty, the Form of Justice is perfect justice, and so forth. Conceiving of Forms in this way was important to Plato because it enabled the philosopher who grasps the entities to be best able to judge to what extent sensible instances of the Forms are good examples of the Forms they approximate.

Scholars disagree about the scope of what is often called "the theory of Forms," and question whether Plato began holding that there are only Forms for a small range of properties, such as tallness, equality, justice, beauty, and so on, and then widened the scope to include Forms corresponding to every term that can be applied to a multiplicity of instances. In the Republic, he writes as if there may be a great multiplicity of Forms—for example, in Book X of that work, we find him writing about the Form of Bed (see Republic X.596b). He may have come to believe that for any set of things that shares some property, there is a Form that gives unity to the set of things (and univocity to the term by which we refer to members of that set of things). Knowledge involves the recognition of the Forms (Republic V.475e-480a), and any reliable application of this knowledge will involve the ability compare the particular sensible instantiations of a property to the Form.

c. Immortality and Reincarnation

In the early transitional dialogue, the Meno, Plato has Socrates introduce the Orphic and Pythagorean idea that souls are immortal and existed before our births. All knowledge, he explains, is actually recollected from this prior existence. In perhaps the most famous passage in this dialogue, Socrates elicits recollection about geometry from one of Meno's slaves (Meno 81a-86b). Socrates' apparent interest in, and fairly sophisticated knowledge of, mathematics appears wholly new in this dialogue. It is an interest, however, that shows up plainly in the middle period dialogues, especially in the middle books of the Republic.

Several arguments for the immortality of the soul, and the idea that souls are reincarnated into different life forms, are also featured in Plato's Phaedo (which also includes the famous scene in which Socrates drinks the hemlock and utters his last words). Stylometry has tended to count the Phaedo among the early dialogues, whereas analysis of philosophical content has tended to place it at the beginning of the middle period. Similar accounts of the transmigration of souls may be found, with somewhat different details, in Book X of the Republic and in the Phaedrus, as well as in several dialogues of the late period, including the Timaeus and the Laws. No traces of the doctrine of recollection, or the theory of reincarnation or transmigration of souls, are to be found in the dialogues we listed above as those of the early period.

d. Moral Psychology

The moral psychology of the middle period dialogues also seems to be quite different from what we find in the early period. In the early dialogues, Plato's Socrates is an intellectualist—that is, he claims that people always act in the way they believe is best for them (at the time of action, at any rate). Hence, all wrongdoing reflects some cognitive error. But in the middle period, Plato conceives of the soul as having (at least) three parts:

  1. a rational part (the part that loves truth, which should rule over the other parts of the soul through the use of reason),
  2. a spirited part (which loves honor and victory), and
  3. an appetitive part (which desires food, drink, and sex),

and justice will be that condition of the soul in which each of these three parts "does its own work," and does not interfere in the workings of the other parts (see esp. Republic IV.435b-445b). It seems clear from the way Plato describes what can go wrong in a soul, however, that in this new picture of moral psychology, the appetitive part of the soul can simply overrule reason's judgments. One may suffer, in this account of psychology, from what is called akrasia or "moral weakness"—in which one finds oneself doing something that one actually believes is not the right thing to do (see especially Republic IV.439e-440b). In the early period, Socrates denied that akrasia was possible: One might change one's mind at the last minute about what one ought to do—and could perhaps change one's mind again later to regret doing what one has done—but one could never do what one actually believed was wrong, at the time of acting.

e. Critique of the Arts

The Republic also introduces Plato's notorious critique of the visual and imitative arts. In the early period works, Socrates contends that the poets lack wisdom, but he also grants that they "say many fine things." In the Republic, on the contrary, it seems that there is little that is fine in poetry or any of the other fine arts. Most of poetry and the other fine arts are to be censored out of existence in the "noble state" (kallipolis) Plato sketches in the Republic, as merely imitating appearances (rather than realities), and as arousing excessive and unnatural emotions and appetites (see esp. Republic X.595b-608b).

f. Platonic Love

In the Symposium, which is normally dated at the beginning of the middle period, and in the Phaedrus, which is dated at the end of the middle period or later yet, Plato introduces his theory of erôs (usually translated as "love"). Several passages and images from these dialogues continued to show up in Western culture—for example, the image of two lovers as being each other's "other half," which Plato assigns to Aristophanes in the Symposium. Also in that dialogue, we are told of the "ladder of love," by which the lover can ascend to direct cognitive contact with (usually compared to a kind of vision of) Beauty Itself. In the Phaedrus, love is revealed to be the great "divine madness" through which the wings of the lover's soul may sprout, allowing the lover to take flight to all of the highest aspirations and achievements possible for humankind. In both of these dialogues, Plato clearly regards actual physical or sexual contact between lovers as degraded and wasteful forms of erotic expression. Because the true goal of erôs is real beauty and real beauty is the Form of Beauty, what Plato calls Beauty Itself, erôs finds its fulfillment only in Platonic philosophy. Unless it channels its power of love into "higher pursuits," which culminate in the knowledge of the Form of Beauty, erôs is doomed to frustration. For this reason, Plato thinks that most people sadly squander the real power of love by limiting themselves to the mere pleasures of physical beauty.

7. Late Transitional and Late Dialogues

a. Philosophical Methodology

One of the novelties of the dialogues after those of the middle period is the introduction of a new philosophical method. This method was introduced probably either late in the middle period or in the transition to the late period, but was increasingly important in the late period. In the early period dialogues, as we have said, the mode of philosophizing was refutative question-and-answer (called elenchos or the "Socratic method"). Although the middle period dialogues continue to show Socrates asking questions, the questioning in these dialogues becomes much more overtly leading and didactic. The highest method of philosophizing discussed in the middle period dialogues, called "dialectic," is never very well explained (at best, it is just barely sketched in the divided line image at the end of Book VI of the Republic). The correct method for doing philosophy, we are now told in the later works, is what Plato identifies as "collection and division," which is perhaps first referred to at Phaedrus 265e. In this method, the philosopher collects all of the instances of some generic category that seem to have common characteristics, and then divides them into specific kinds until they cannot be further subdivided. This method is explicitly and extensively on display in the Sophist, Statesman, and Philebus.

b. Critique of the Earlier Theory of Forms

One of the most puzzling features of the late dialogues is the strong suggestion in them that Plato has reconsidered his theory of Forms in some way. Although there seems still in the late dialogues to be a theory of Forms (although the theory is, quite strikingly, wholly unmentioned in the Theaetetus, a later dialogue on the nature of knowledge), where it does appear in the later dialogues, it seems in several ways to have been modified from its conception in the middle period works. Perhaps the most dramatic signal of such a change in the theory appears first in the Parmenides, which appears to subject the middle period version of the theory to a kind of "Socratic" refutation, only this time, the main refuter is the older Eleatic philosopher Parmenides, and the hapless victim of the refutation is a youthful Socrates. The most famous (and apparently fatal) of the arguments provided by Parmenides in this dialogue has come to be known as the "Third Man Argument," which suggests that the conception of participation (by which individual objects take on the characters of the Forms) falls prey to an infinite regress: If individual male things are male in virtue of participation in the Form of Man, and the Form of Man is itself male, then what is common to both The Form of Man and the particular male things must be that they all participate in some (other) Form, say, Man 2. But then, if Man 2 is male, then what it has in common with the other male things is participation in some further Form, Man 3, and so on. That Plato's theory is open to this problem gains support from the notion, mentioned above, that Forms are exemplars. If the Form of Man is itself a (perfect) male, then the Form shares a property in common with the males that participate in it. But since the Theory requires that for any group of entities with a common property, there is a Form to explain the commonality, it appears that the theory does indeed give rise to the vicious regress.

There has been considerable controversy for many years over whether Plato believed that the Theory of Forms was vulnerable to the "Third Man" argument, as Aristotle believed it was, and so uses the Parmenides to announce his rejection of the Theory of Forms, or instead believed that the Third Man argument can be avoided by making adjustments to the Theory of Forms. Of relevance to this discussion is the relative dating of the Timaeus and the Parmenides, since the Theory of Forms very much as it appears in the middle period works plays a prominent role in the Timaeus. Thus, the assignment of a later date to the Timaeus shows that Plato did not regard the objection to the Theory of Forms raised in the Parmenides as in any way decisive. In any event, it is agreed on all sides that Plato's interest in the Theory shifted in the Sophist and Stateman to the exploration of the logical relations that hold between abstract entities. In the Laws, Plato's last (and unfinished) work, the Theory of Forms appears to have dropped out altogether. Whatever value Plato believed that knowledge of abstract entities has for the proper conduct of philosophy, he no longer seems to have believed that such knowledge is necessary for the proper running of a political community.

c. The "Eclipse" of Socrates

In several of the late dialogues, Socrates is even further marginalized. He is either represented as a mostly mute bystander (in the Sophist and Statesman), or else absent altogether from the cast of characters (in the Laws and Critias). In the Theaetetus and Philebus, however, we find Socrates in the familiar leading role. The so-called "eclipse" of Socrates in several of the later dialogues has been a subject of much scholarly discussion.

d. The Myth of Atlantis

Plato's famous myth of Atlantis is first given in the Timaeus, which scholars now generally agree is quite late, despite being dramatically placed on the day after the discussion recounted in the Republic. The myth of Atlantis is continued in the unfinished dialogue intended to be the sequel to the Timaeus, the Critias.

e. The Creation of the Universe

The Timaeus is also famous for its account of the creation of the universe by the Demiurge. Unlike the creation by the God of medieval theologians, Plato's Demiurge does not create ex nihilo, but rather orders the cosmos out of chaotic elemental matter, imitating the eternal Forms. Plato takes the four elements, fire, air, water, and earth (which Plato proclaims to be composed of various aggregates of triangles), making various compounds of these into what he calls the Body of the Universe. Of all of Plato's works, the Timaeus provides the most detailed conjectures in the areas we now regard as the natural sciences: physics, astronomy, chemistry, and biology.

f. The Laws

In the Laws, Plato's last work, the philosopher returns once again to the question of how a society ought best to be organized. Unlike his earlier treatment in the Republic, however, the Laws appears to concern itself less with what a best possible state might be like, and much more squarely with the project of designing a genuinely practicable, if admittedly not ideal, form of government. The founders of the community sketched in the Laws concern themselves with the empirical details of statecraft, fashioning rules to meet the multitude of contingencies that are apt to arise in the "real world" of human affairs. A work enormous length and complexity, running some 345 Stephanus pages, the Laws was unfinished at the time of Plato's death. According to Diogenes Laertius (3.37), it was left written on wax tablets.

8. References and Further Reading

a. Greek Texts

  • Platonis Opera (in 5 volumes) - The Oxford Classical Texts (Oxford: Oxford University Press):
  • Volume I (E. A. Duke et al., eds., 1995): Euthyphro, Apologia Socratis, Crito, Phaedo, Cratylus, Theaetetus, Sophista, Politicus.
  • Volume II (John Burnet, ed., 1901): Parmenides, Philebus, Symposium, Phaedrus, Alcibiades I, Alcibiades II, Hipparchus, Amatores.
  • Volume III (John Burnet, ed., 1903): Theages, Charmides, Laches, Lysis, Euthydemus, Protagoras, Gorgias, Meno, Hippias Maior, Hippias Minor, Io, Menexenus.
  • Volume IV (John Burnet, ed., 1978): Clitopho, Respublica, Timaeus, Critias.
  • Volume V (John Burnet, ed. 1907): Minos, Leges, Epinomis, Epistulae, Definitiones, De Iusto, De Virtute, Demodocus, Sisyphus, Eryxias, Axiochus.
    • The Oxford Classical Texts are the standard Greek texts of Plato's works, including all of the spuria and dubia except for the epigrams, the Greek texts of which may be found in Hermann Beckby (ed.), Anthologia Graeca (Munich: Heimeran, 1957).

b. Translations into English

  • Cooper, J. M. (ed.), Plato: Complete Works (Indianapolis: Hackett, 1997).
    • Contains very recent translations of all of the Platonic works, dubia, spuria, and epigrams. Now generally regarded as the standard for English translations.

c. Plato's Socrates and the Historical Socrates

  • Kahn, Charles H., Plato and the Socratic Dialogue (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996).
    • Kahn's own version of the "unitarian" reading of Plato's dialogues. Although scholars have not widely accepted Kahn's positions, Kahn offers several arguments for rejecting the more established held "developmentalist" position.
  • Vlastos, Gregory, Socrates, Ironist and Moral Philosopher (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press and Ithaca, N.Y.: Cornell University Press, 1991).
    • Chapters 2 and 3 of this book are invariably cited as providing the most influential recent arguments for the "historicist" version of the "developmentalist" position.

d. Socrates and Plato's Early Period Dialogues

  • Benson, Hugh H. (ed.), Essays on the Philosophy of Socrates (New York: Oxford University Press, 1992).
    • A collection of previously published articles by various authors on Socrates and Plato's early dialogues.
  • Brickhouse, Thomas C. and Nicholas D. Smith, Plato's Socrates (New York: Oxford University Press, 1994).
    • Six chapters, each on different topics in the study of Plato's early or Socratic dialogues.
  • Brickhouse, Thomas C. and Nicholas D. Smith, The Philosophy of Socrates (Boulder: Westview, 2000).
    • Seven chapters, each on different topics in the study of Plato's early or Socratic dialogues. Some changes in views from those offered in their 1994 book.
  • Prior, William (ed.), Socrates: Critical Assessments (London and New York, 1996) in four volumes: I: The Socratic Problem and Socratic Ignorance; II: Issues Arising from the Trial of Socrates; III: Socratic Method; IV: Happiness and Virtue.
    • A collection of previously published articles by various authors on Socrates and Plato's early dialogues.
  • Santas, Gerasimos Xenophon, Socrates: Philosophy in Plato's Early Dialogues (Boston and London: Routledge, 1979).
    • Eight chapters, each on different topics in the study of Plato's early or Socratic dialogues.
  • Taylor, C. C. W. Socrates: A Very Short Introduction (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1998).
    • Very short, indeed, but nicely written and generally very reliable.
  • Vlastos, Gregory, Socrates, Ironist and Moral Philosopher (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press and Ithaca, N.Y.: Cornell University Press, 1991). (Also cited in VIII.3, above.)
    • Eight chapters, each on different topics in the study of Plato's early or Socratic dialogues.
  • Vlastos, Gregory, Socratic Studies (ed. Myles Burnyeat; Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1994).
    • Edited and published after Vlastos's death. A collection of Vlastos's papers on Socrates not published in Vlastos's 1991 book.
  • Vlastos, Gregory (ed.) The Philosophy of Socrates (South Bend: University of Notre Dame Press, 1980).
    • A collection of papers by various authors on Socrates and Plato's early dialogues. Although now somewhat dated, several articles in this collection continue to be widely cited and studied.

e. General Books on Plato

  • Cherniss, Harold, The Riddle of the Early Academy (Berkeley: University of California Press, 1945).
    • A study of reports in the Early Academy, following Plato's death, of the so-called "unwritten doctrines" of Plato.
  • Fine, Gail (ed.), Plato I: Metaphysics and Epistemology and Plato II: Ethics, Politics, Religion and the Soul (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1999).
    • A collection of previously published papers by various authors, mostly on Plato's middle and later periods.
  • Grote, George, Plato and the Other Companions of Sokrates 2nd ed. 3 vols. (London: J. Murray, 1867).
    • 3-volume collection with general discussion of "the Socratics" other than Plato, as well as specific discussions of each of Plato's works.
  • Guthrie, W. K. C., A History of Greek Philosophy (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press) vols. 3 (1969), 4 (1975) and 5 (1978).
    • Volume 3 is on the Sophists and Socrates; volume 4 is on Plato's early dialogues and continues with chapters on Phaedo, Symposium, and Phaedrus, and then a final chapter on the Republic.
  • Irwin, Terence, Plato's Ethics (New York and Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1995).
    • Systematic discussion of the ethical thought in Plato's works.
  • Kraut, Richard (ed.), The Cambridge Companion to Plato (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1992).
    • A collection of original discussions of various general topics about Plato and the dialogues.
  • Smith, Nicholas D. (ed.), Plato: Critical Assessments (London and New York: Routledge, 1998) in four volumes: I: General Issues of Interpretation; II: Plato's Middle Period: Metaphysics and Epistemology; III: Plato's Middle Period: Psychology and Value Theory; IV: Plato's Later Works.
    • A collection of previously published articles by various authors on interpretive problems and on Plato's middle and later periods. Plato's early period dialogues are covered in this series by Prior 1996 (see VIII.4).
  • Vlastos, Gregory, Platonic Studies 2nd ed. (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1981).
    • A collection of Vlastos's papers on Plato, including some important earlier work on the early dialogues.
  • Vlastos, Gregory, Plato I: Metaphysics and Epistemology and Plato II: Ethics, Politics, and Philosophy of Art and Religion (South Bend: University of Notre Dame Press, 1987).
    • A collection of papers by various authors on Plato's middle period and later dialogues. Although now somewhat dated, several articles in this collection continue to be widely cited and studied.

Author Information

Thomas Brickhouse
Lynchburg College
U. S. A.


Nicholas D. Smith
Lewis & Clark College
U. S. A.

Thomas Aquinas (1225—1274)


Saint Thomas Aquinas was a Catholic Priest in the Dominican Order and one of the most important Medieval philosophers and theologians. He was immensely influenced by scholasticism and Aristotle and known for his synthesis of the two aforementioned traditions. Although he wrote many works of philosophy and theology throughout his life, his most influential work is the Summa Theologica which consists of three parts.

The first part is on God. In it, he gives five proofs for God's existence as well as an explication of His attributes. He argues for the actuality and incorporeality of God as the unmoved mover and describes how God moves through His thinking and willing.

The second part is on Ethics. Thomas argues for a variation of the Aristotelian Virtue Ethics. However, unlike Aristotle, he argues for a connection between the virtuous man and God by explaining how the virtuous act is one towards the blessedness of the Beatific Vision (beata visio).

The last part of the Summa is on Christ and was unfinished when Thomas died. In it, he shows how Christ not only offers salvation, but represents and protects humanity on Earth and in Heaven. This part also briefly discusses the sacraments and eschatology. The Summa remains the most influential of Thomas’s works and is mostly what will be discussed in this overview of his philosophy.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Writings
    1. The Summa Part I: God
    2. The Summa Part II: Ethics
    3. The Summa Part III: Christ
  3. The Sacraments

1. Life

The birth-year of Thomas Aquinas is commonly given as 1227, but he was probably born early in 1225 at his father's castle of Roccasecea (75 m. e.s.e. of Rome) in Neapolitan territory. He died at the monastery of Fossanova, one mile from Sonnino (64 m. s.e. of Rome), Mar. 7, 1274. His father was Count Landulf of an old high-born south Italian family, and his mother was Countess Theodora of Theate, of noble Norman descent. In his fifth year he was sent for his early education to the monastery of Monte Cassino, where his father's brother Sinibald was abbot. Later he studied in Naples. By about 1243 he determined to enter the Dominican order; but on the way to Rome he was seized by his brothers and brought back to his parents at the castle of S. Giovanni, where he was held a captive for a year or two and besieged with prayers, threats, and even sensual temptation to make him relinquish his purpose. Finally the family yielded and the order sent Thomas to Cologne to study under Albertus Magnus, where he arrived probably toward the end of 1244. He accompanied Albertus to Paris in 1245, remained there with his teacher, continuing his studies for three years, and followed Albertus at the latter's return to Cologne in 1248. For several years longer he remained with the famous philosopher of scholasticism, presumably teaching. This long association of Thomas with the great polyhistor was the most important influence in his development; it made him a comprehensive scholar and won him permanently for the Aristotelian method. Around 1252 Thomas went to Paris for the master's degree, which he found some difficulty in attaining owing to attacks, at that time on the mendicant orders. Ultimately, however, he received the degree and entered ceremoniously upon his office of teaching in 1257; he taught in Paris for several years and there wrote certain of his works and began others. In 1259 he was present at an important chapter of his order at Valenciennes at the solicitation of Pope Urban IV. Therefore not before the latter part of 1261, he took up residence in Rome. In 1269-71 he was again active in Paris. In 1272 the provincial chapter at Florence empowered him to found a new studium generale at any place he should choose, and he selected Naples. Early in 1274 the pope directed him to attend the Council of Lyons and he undertook the journey, although he was far from well. On the way he stopped at the castle of a niece and became seriously ill. He wished to end his days in a monastery and not being able to reach a house of the Dominicans he was carried to the Cistercian Fossanova. There he died and his remains were preserved.

2. Writings

The writings of Thomas may be classified as: (1) exegetical, homiletical, and liturgical; (2) dogmatic, apologetic, and ethical; and (3) philosophical. Among the genuine works of the first class were: Commentaries on Job (1261-65); on Psalms, according to some a reportatum, or report of speeches furnished by his companion Raynaldus; on Isaiah; the Catena aurea, which is a running commentary on the four Gospels, constructed on numerous citations from the Fathers; probably a Commentary on Canticles, and on Jeremiah; and wholly or partly reportata, on John, on Matthew, and on the epistles of Paul; including, according to one authority, Hebrews i.-x. Thomas prepared for Urban IV: Officium de corpore Christi (1264); and the following works may be either genuine or reportataExpositio angelicce salutationisTractatus de decem praeceptisOrationis dominico expositio; Sermones pro dominicis diebus et pro sanctorum solemnitatibusSermones de angelisand Sermones de quadragesima. Of his sermons only manipulated copies are extant. In the second division were: In quatitor sententiarum libros, of his first Paris sojourn; Questiones disputatce, written at Paris and Rome; Questiones quodlibetales duodecini; Summa catholicce fidei contra gentiles (1261-C,4); andthe Summa theologica. To the dogmatic works belong also certain commentaries, as follows: Expositio in librum beati Dionysii de divinis nominibitsExpositiones primoe et secundce; In Boethii libros de hebdomadibus; and Proeclare quoestiones super librum Boethii de trinitate. A large number ofopuscitla also belonged to this group. Of philosophical writings there are cataloged thirteen commentaries on Aristotle, besides numerous philosophical opuscula of which fourteen are classed as genuine.

a. The Summa Part I: God

The greatest work of Thomas was the Summa, and it is the fullest presentation of his views. He worked on it from the time of Clement IV (after 1265) until the end of his life. When he died he had reached question ninety of part III, on the subject of penance. What was lacking was afterward added from the fourth book of his commentary on the "Sentences" of Peter Lombard as a supplementum, which is not found in manuscripts of the thirteenth and fourteenth centuries. The Summa consists of three parts. Part I treats of God, who is the "first cause, himself uncaused" (primum movens immobile) and as such existent only in act (actu), that is pure actuality without potentiality and, therefore, without corporeality. His essence is actus purus et perfectus. This follows from the fivefold proof for the existence of God; namely, there must be a first mover himself unmoved, a first cause in the chain of causes, an absolutely necessary being, an absolutely perfect being, and a rational designer. In this connection the thoughts of the unity, infinity, unchangeableness, and goodness of the highest being are deduced. The spiritual being of God is further defined as thinking and willing. His knowledge is absolutely perfect since he knows himself and all things as appointed by him. Since every knowing being strives after the thing known as end, will is implied in knowing. Inasmuch as God knows himself as the perfect good, he wills himself as end. But in that everything is willed by God, everything is brought by the divine will to himself in the relation of means to end. Therein God wills good to every being which exists, that is he loves it; and, therefore, love is the fundamental relation of God to the world. If the divine love be thought of simply as act of will, it exists for every creature in like measure: but if the good assured by love to the individual be thought of, it exists for different beings in various degrees. In so far as the loving God gives to every being what it needs in relation practical reason, affording the idea of the moral law of nature, so important in medieval ethics.

b. The Summa Part II: Ethics

The first part of the Summa is summed up in the thought that God governs the world as the universal first cause. God sways the intellect in that he gives the power to know aid impresses the species intelligibileson the mind; and he ways the will in that he holds the good before it as aim, and creates the virtus volendi. To will is nothing else than a certain inclination toward the object of the volition which is the universal good. God works all in all, but so that things also themselves exert their proper efficiency. Here the Areopagitic ideas of the graduated effects of created things play their part in Thomas's thought. The second part of the Summa (consisting of two parts, namely, prima secundae and secundae, secunda) follows this complex of ideas. Its theme is man's striving after the highest end, which is the blessedness of the visio beata. Here Thomas develops his system of ethics, which has its root in Aristotle. In a chain of acts of will man strives for the highest end. They are free acts in so far as man has in himself the knowledge of their end and therein the principle of action. In that the will wills the end, it wills also the appropriate means, chooses freely and completes the consensus. Whether the act be good or evil depends on the end. The "human reason" pronounces judgment concerning the character of the end, it is, therefore, the law for action. Human acts, however, are meritorious in so far as they promote the purpose of God and his honor. By repeating a good action man acquires a moral habit or a quality which enables him to do the good gladly and easily. This is true, however, only of the intellectual and moral virtues, which Thomas treats after the mariner of Aristotle; the theological virtues are imparted by God to man as a "disposition" from which the acts here proceed, but while they strengthen, they do not form it. The "disposition" of evil is the opposite alternative. An act becomes evil through deviation from the reason and the divine moral law. Therefore, sin involves two factors: its substance or matter is lust; in form, however, it is deviation from the divine law. Sin has its origin in the will, which decides, against the reason, for a changeable good. Since, however, the will also moves the other powers of man, sin has its seat in these too. By choosing such a lower good as end, the will is misled by self-love, so that this works as cause in every sin. God is not the cause of sin, since, on the contrary, he draws all things to himself. But from another side God is the cause of all things, so he is efficacious also in sin as *-ctio but not as ens. The devil is not directly the cause of sin, but he incites by working on the imagination and the sensuous impulse of man, as men or things may also do. Sin is original. Adam's first sin passes upon himself and all the succeeding race; because he is the head of the human race and "by virtue of procreation human nature is transmitted and along with nature its infection." The powers of generation are, therefore, designated especially as "infected."

In every work of God both justice and mercy are united, and his justice always presupposes his mercy since he owes no one anything and gives more bountifully than is due. As God rules in the world, the "plan of the order of things" preexists in him; i.e., his providence and the exercise of it in his government are what condition as cause everything which comes to pass in the world. Hence follows predestination: from eternity, some are destined to eternal life; while others "he permits some to fall short of that end." Reprobation, however, is more than mere foreknowledge; it is the "will of permitting anyone to fall into sin and incur the penalty of condemnation for sin." The effect of predestination is grace. Since God is the first cause of everything, he is the cause of even the free acts of men through predestination. Determinism is deeply grounded in the system of Thomas; things with their source of becoming in God are ordered from eternity as means for the realization of his end in himself. On moral grounds Thomas advocates freedom energetically; but, with his premises, he can have in mind only the psychological form of self-motivation. Nothing in the world is accidental or free, although it may appear so in reference to the proximate cause. From this point of view miracles become necessary in themselves and are to be considered merely as inexplicable to man. From the point of view of the first cause all is unchangeable; although from the limited point of view of the secondary cause miracles may be spoken of. In his doctrine of the Trinity, Thomas starts from the Augustinian system. Since God has only the functions of thinking and willing, only twoprocessiones can be asserted from the Father. However, these establish definite relations of the persons of the Trinity to each other. The relations must be conceived as real and not as merely ideal; for, as with creatures relations arise through certain accidents, since in God there is no accident but all is substance, it follows that "the relation really existing in God is the same as the essence according to the thing." From another side, however, the relations as real must be really distinguished one from another. Therefore, three persons are to be affirmed in God. Man stands opposite to God; he consists of soul and body. The "intellectual soul" consists of intellect and will. Furthermore the soul is the absolutely indivisible form of man; it is immaterial substance, but not one and the same in all men (as the Averrhoists assumed). The soul's power of knowing has two sides; a passive (the intellectus possibilis) and an active (theintellectus agens). It is the capacity to form concepts and to abstract the mind's images (species) from the objects perceived by sense. However, since the abstractions of the intellect from individual things is a universal, the mind knows the universal primarily and directly, and knows the singular only indirectly by virtue of a certain reflection. As certain principles are immanent in the mind for its speculative activity, so also a "special disposition of works," or the synderesis (rudiment of conscience), is inborn in the scholastics. Held to creationism, they therefore taught that the souls are created by God. Two things according to Thomas constituted man's righteousness in paradise-the justitia originalis or the harmony of all man's powers before they were blighted by desire, and the possession of the gratia gratum faciens(the continuous indwelling power of good). Both are lost through original sin, which in form is the "loss of original righteousness." The consequence of this loss is the disorder and maiming of man's nature, which shows itself in "ignorance, malice, moral weakness, and especially in concupiscentia, which is the material principle of original sin." The course of thought here is as follows: when the first man transgressed the order of his nature appointed by nature and grace, he, and with him the human race, lost this order. This negative state is the essence of original sin. From it follow an impairment and perversion of human nature in which thenceforth lower aims rule contrary to nature and release the lower element in man. Since sin is contrary to the divine order, it is guilt, and subject to punishment. Guilt and punishment correspond to each other; and since the "apostasy from the invariable good which is infinite," fulfilled by man, is unending, it merits everlasting punishment.

c. The Summa Part III: Christ

The way which leads to God is Christ: and Christ is the theme of part III. It can not be asserted that the incarnation was absolutely necessary, "since God in his omnipotent power could have repaired human nature in many other ways": but it was the most suitable way both for the purpose of instruction and of satisfaction. The unio between the logos and the human nature is a "relation" between the divine and the human nature which comes about by both natures being brought together in the one person of the logos. An incarnation can be spoken of only in the sense that the human nature began to be in the eternal hypostasis of the divine nature. So Christ is unum since his human nature lacks the hypostasis. The person of the logos, accordingly, has assumed the impersonal human nature, and in such way that the assumption of the soul became the means for the assumption of the body. This union with the human soul is the gratia unionis which leads to the impartation of the gratia habitualis from the logos to the human nature. Thereby all human potentialities are made perfect in Jesus. Besides the perfections given by the vision of God, which Jesus enjoyed from the beginning, he receives all others by the gratia habitualis. In so far, however, as it is the limited human nature which receives these perfections, they are finite. This holds both of the knowledge and the will of Christ. The logos impresses the species intelligibiles of all created things on the soul, but the intellectus agens transforms them gradually into the impressions of sense. On another side, the soul of Christ works miracles only as instrument of the logos, since omnipotence in no way appertains to this human soul in itself. Furthermore, Christ's human nature partook of imperfections, on the one side to make his true humanity evident, on another side because he would bear the general consequences of sin for humanity. Christ experienced suffering, but blessedness reigned in his soul, which, however, did not extend to his body. Concerning redemption, Thomas teaches that Christ is to be regarded as redeemer after his human nature but in such way that the human nature produces divine effects as organ of divinity. The one side of the work of redemption consists herein, that Christ as head of humanity imparts perfection and virtue to his members. He is the teacher and example of humanity; his whole life and suffering as well as his work after he is exalted serve this end.

This is the first course of thought. Then follows a second complex of thoughts which has the idea of satisfaction as its center. To be sure, God as the highest being could forgive sins without satisfaction; but because his justice and mercy could be best revealed through satisfaction he chose this way. As little, however, as satisfaction is necessary in itself, so little does it offer an equivalent, in a correct sense, for guilt; it is rather a "super-abundant satisfaction," since on account of the divine subject in Christ in a certain sense his suffering and activity are infinite. With this thought the strict logical deduction of Anselm's theory is given up. Christ's suffering bore personal character in that it proceeded out of love and obedience. It was an offering brought to God, which as personal act had the character of merit. Thereby Christ "merited" salvation for men. As Christ still influences men, so does he still work in their behalf continually in heaven through the intercession (interpellatio). In this way Christ as head of humanity effects the forgiveness of their sins, their reconciliation with God, their immunity from punishment, deliverance from the devil, and the opening of heaven's gate. But inasmuch as all these benefits are already offered through the inner operation of the love of Christ, Thomas has combined the theories of Anselm and Abelard by joining the one to the other.

3. The Sacraments

The doctrine of the sacraments follows the Christology; for the sacraments "have efficacy from the incarnate Word himself." The sacraments are signs which not only signify sanctification, but also effect it. That they bring spiritual gifts in sensuous form, moreover, is inevitable because of the sensuous nature of man. The res sensibles are the matter, the words of institution are the form of the sacranieits. Contrary to the Franciscan view that the sacraments are mere symbol, whose efficacy God accompanies with a directly following creative act in the soul, Thomas holds it not unfit to say with Hugo of St. Victor that "a sacrament contains grace," or to teach of the sacraments that they "cause grace." Thomas attempts to remove the difficulty of a sensuous thing producing a creative effect by a distinction between the causa principalis et instrumentalism. God as the principal cause works through the sensuous thing as the means ordained by him for his end. "Just as instrumental power is acquired by the instrument from this, that it is moved by the principal agent, so also the sacrament obtains spiritual power from the benediction of Christ and the application of the minister to the use of the sacrament. There is spiritual power in the sacraments in so far as they have been ordained by God for a spiritual effect." This spiritual power remains in the sensuous thing until it has attained its purpose. Thomas distinguished the gratia sacramentalis from the gratia virtutum et donorum in that the former in general perfects the essence and the powers of the soul, and the latter in particular brings to pass necessary spiritual effects for the Christian life. Although, later this distinction was ignored.

In a single statement the effect of the sacraments is to infuse justifying grace into men. Christ's humanity was the instrument for the operation of his divinity; the sacraments are the instruments through which this operation of Christ's humanity passes over to men. Christ's humanity served his divinity as instrumentum conjuncture, like the hand; the sacraments are instruments separate, like a staff; the former can use the latter, as the hand can use a staff.

Of Thomas' eschatology, according to the commentary on the "Sentences," only a brief account can here be given. Everlasting blessedness consists for Thomas in the vision of God; and this vision consists not in an abstraction or in a mental image supernaturally produced, but the divine substance itself is beheld. In such a manner, God himself becomes immediately the form of the beholding intellect; that is, God is the object of the vision and at the same time causes the vision. The perfection of the blessed also demands that the body be restored to the soul as something to be made perfect by it. Since blessedness consist in operation, it is made more perfect in that the soul has a definite opcralio with the body. Although, the peculiar act of blessedness (that is, the vision of God) has nothing to do with the body.

Author Information

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Buddha (c. 480 B.C.E.—c. 400 B.C.E.)

buddhaThe historical Buddha, also known as Gotama Buddha, Siddhārtha Gautama, and Buddha Śākyamuni, was born in Lumbini, in the Nepalese region of Terai, near the Indian border. He is one of the most important Asian thinkers and spiritual masters of all time, and he contributed to many areas of philosophy, including epistemology, metaphysics and ethics. The Buddha’s teaching formed the foundation for Buddhist philosophy, initially developed in South Asia, then later in the rest of Asia. Buddhism and Buddhist philosophy now have a global following.

In epistemology, the Buddha seeks a middle way between the extremes of dogmatism and skepticism, emphasizing personal experience, a pragmatic attitude, and the use of critical thinking toward all types of knowledge. In ethics, the Buddha proposes a threefold understanding of action: mental, verbal, and bodily. In metaphysics, the Buddha argues that there are no self-caused entities, and that everything dependently arises from or upon something else. This allows the Buddha to provide a criticism of souls and personal identity; that criticism forms the foundation for his views about the reality of rebirth and an ultimate liberated state called “Nirvana.” Nirvana is not primarily an absolute reality beyond or behind the universe but rather a special state of mind in which all the causes and conditions responsible for rebirth and suffering have been eliminated. In philosophical anthropology, the Buddha explains human identity without a permanent and substantial self. The doctrine of non-self, however, does not imply the absolute inexistence of any type of self whatsoever, but is compatible with a conventional self composed of five psycho-physical aggregates, although all of them are unsubstantial and impermanent. Selves are thus conceived as evolving processes causally constrained by their past.

Table of Contents

  1. Interpreting the Historical Buddha
    1. Dates
    2. Sources
    3. Life
    4. Significance
  2. The Buddha’s Epistemology
    1. The Extremes of Dogmatism and Skepticism
    2. The Role of Personal Experience and the Buddha’s Wager
    3. Interpretations of the Buddha’s Advice to the Kālāma People
    4. Higher Knowledge and the Question of Empiricism
  3. The Buddha’s Cosmology and Metaphysics
    1. The Universe and the Role of Gods
    2. The Four Noble Truths or Realities
    3. Ontology of Suffering: the Five Aggregates
    4. Arguments for the Doctrine of Non-self
    5. Human Identity and the Meaning of Non-self
    6. Causality and the Principle of Dependent Arising
  4. Nirvana and the Silence of the Buddha
    1. Two Kinds of Nirvana and the Undetermined Questions
    2. Eternalism, Nihilism, and the Middle Way
  5. Buddhist Ethics
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Interpreting the Historical Buddha

a. Dates

There is no complete agreement among scholars and Buddhist traditions regarding the dates of the historical Buddha. The most common dates among Buddhists are those of the Theravāda school, 623-543 B.C.E. From the middle of the 19th century until recently, Western scholars had believed the dates of the Buddha to be ca. 560-480 B.C.E. However, after the publication in 1991-2 of the proceedings of the international symposium on the date of the historical Buddha held in Göttingen in 1988, the original consensus on these dates no longer exists.

Although there is no conclusive evidence for any specific date, most current scholars locate the Buddha’s life one hundred years earlier, around the fifth century B.C.E. Some of the new dates for the Buddha’s "death" or more accurately, for his parinirvāṇa are: ca. 404 B.C.E. (R. Gombrich), between 410-390 B.C.E. (K.R. Norman), ca. 400 B.C.E. (R. Hikata), ca. 397 B.C.E. (K.T.S. Sarao), between ca.400-350 B.C.E. (H. Bechert), 383 B.C.E. (H. Nakamura), 368 B.C.E. (A. Hirakawa), between 420-380 B.C.E. (A. Bareau).

b. Sources

The historical Buddha did not write down any of his teachings, they were passed down orally from generation to generation for at least three centuries. Some scholars have attempted to distinguish the Buddha’s original teachings from those developed by his early disciples. Unfortunately, the contradictory conclusions have led most scholars to be skeptical about the possibility of knowing what the Buddha really taught. This however, does not mean that all Buddhist texts that attribute teachings to the Buddha are equally valuable to reconstruct his thought. The early sūtras in Pāli and other Middle Indo-Aryan languages are historically and linguistically closer to the cultural context of the Buddha than Mahāyāna sūtras in Sanskrit, Tibetan, and Chinese. This does not imply that later translations of the early sūtras in Chinese (there are no Tibetan translations of the early sūtras) are less authentic or useless in reconstructing the philosophy of the Buddha. On the contrary, the comparative study of Pāli and Chinese versions of the early sūtras can help to infer what might have been the Buddha’s position on a number of issues.

Following what seems to be a growing scholarly tendency, I will reconstruct the philosophy of the historical Buddha by drawing on the Sutta Piṭaka of the Pāli canon. More specifically, our main sources are the first four Pāli Nikāyas (Dīgha, Majjhima, Saṃyutta, Aṅguttara) and some texts of the fifth Pāli Nikāya (Dhammapada, Udāna, Itivuttaka, and Sutta Nipāta). I do not identify these sources with the Buddha’s “ipsissima verba,” that is, with “the very words” of the Buddha, even less with his “actual” thought. Whether these sources are faithful to the actual thought and teachings of the historical Buddha is an unanswerable question; I can only say that to my knowledge there are not better sources to reconstruct the philosophy of the Buddha.

According to the traditional Buddhist account, shortly after the Buddha’s death five hundred disciples gathered to compile his teachings. The Buddha’s personal assistant, Ānanda, recited the first part of the Buddhist canon, the Sūtra Piṭaka, which contains discourses in dialogue form between the Buddha, his disciples, and his contemporaries on a variety of doctrinal and spiritual questions. Ānanda is reported to have recited the sutras just as he had heard them from the Buddha; that is why Buddhist sutras begin with the words “Thus have I heard.” Another disciple, Upāli, recited the second part of the Buddhist canon, the Vinaya Piṭaka, which also contains sutras, but primarily addresses the rules that govern a monastic community. After the recitation of Ānanda and Upāli, the other disciples approved what they had heard and communally recited the teachings as a sign of agreement. The third part of the Buddhist canon or Abhidharma Piṭaka, was not recited at that moment. The Theravāda tradition claims that the Buddha taught the Abhidharma while visiting the heaven where his mother was residing.

From a scholarly perspective, the former account is questionable. It might be the case that a large collection of Buddhist texts was written down for the first time in Sri Lanka during the first century B.C.E. However, the extant Pāli canon shows clear signs of historical development in terms of both content and language. The three parts of the Pāli canon are not as contemporary as the traditional Buddhist account seems to suggest: the Sūtra Piṭaka is older than the Vinaya Piṭaka, and the Abhidharma Piṭaka represents scholastic developments originated at least two centuries after the other two parts of the canon. The Vinaya Piṭaka appears to have grown gradually as a commentary and justification of the monastic code (Prātimokṣa), which presupposes a transition from a community of wandering mendicants (the Sūtra Piṭaka period ) to a more sedentary monastic community (the Vinaya Piṭaka period). Even within the Sūtra Piṭaka it is possible to detect older and later texts.

Neither the Sūtra Piṭaka nor the Vinaya Piṭaka of the Pāli canon could have been recited at once by one person and repeated by the entire Buddhist community. Nevertheless, the Sūtra Piṭaka of the Pāli canon is of particular importance in reconstructing the philosophy of Buddha for four main reasons. First, it contains the oldest texts of the only complete canon of early Indian Buddhism, which belong to the only surviving school of that period, namely, the Theravāda school, prevalent in Sri Lanka and Southeast Asia. Second, it has been preserved in a Middle Indo-Aryan language closely related to various Prakrit dialects spoken in North of India during the third century B.C.E., including the area where the Buddha spent most of his teaching years (Magadha). Third, it expresses a fairly consistent set of doctrines and practices. Fourth, it is strikingly similar to another version of the early Sūtra Piṭaka extant in Chinese (Āgamas). This similarity seems to indicate that a great part of the Sūtra Piṭaka in Pāli does not contain exclusively Theravāda texts, and belongs to a common textual tradition probably prior to the existence of Buddhist schools.

c. Life

Since the Pāli Nikāyas contain much more information about the teachings of the Buddha than about his life, it seems safe to postulate that the early disciples of the Buddha were more interested in preserving his teachings than in transmitting all the details of his life. The first complete biographies of the Buddha as well as the Jātaka stories about his former lives appeared centuries later, even after, and arguably as a reaction against, the dry lists and categorizations of early Abhidharma literature. The first complete biography of the Buddha in Pāli is the Nidānakathā, which serves as an introduction to the Jātaka verses found in the fifth Pāli Nikāya. In Sanskrit, the most popular biographies of the Buddha are the Buddhacarita attributed to the Indian poet Aśvaghoṣa (second century C.E), the Mahāvastu, and the Lalitavistara, both composed in the first century C.E.

The first four Pāli Nikāyas contain only fragmented information about the Buddha’s life. Especially important are the Mahāpadāna-suttanta, the Ariyapariyesanā-suttanta, the Mahāsaccaka-suttanta, and the Mahāparinibbāna-suttanta. According to the Mahāpadāna-suttanta, the lives of all Buddhas or perfectly enlightened beings follow a similar pattern. Like all Buddhas of the past, the Buddha of this cosmic era, also known as Gautama (Gotama in Pāli), was born into a noble family. The Buddha’s parents were King Śuddhodana and Queen Māyā. He was a member of the Śakya clan and his name was Siddhartha Gautama. Even though he was born in Lumbinī while his mother was traveling to her parents’ home, he spent the first twenty-nine years of his life in the royal capital, Kapilavastu, in the Nepalese region of Terai, close to the Indian border.

Like all past Buddhas, the conception and birth of Gautama Buddha are considered miraculous events. For instance, when all Buddhas descend into their mothers’ wombs from a heaven named Tuṣita, a splendid light shines forth and the entire universe quakes; their mothers are immaculate, healthy, and without pain of any sort during their ten months of pregnancy, but they die a week after giving birth. Buddha babies are born clean, though they are ritually bathed with two streams of water that fall from the sky; they all take seven steps toward the north and solemnly announce that this is their last rebirth.

Like former Buddhas, prince Siddhartha enjoyed all types of luxuries and sensual pleasures during his youth. Unsatisfied with this type of life, he had a crisis when he realized that everything was ephemeral and that his existence was subject to old age, sickness, and death. After seeing the serene joy of a monk and out of compassion for all living beings, he renounced his promising future as prince in order to start a long quest for a higher purpose, nirvāṇa (Pali nibbāna), which entails the cessation of old age, sickness and death. Later traditions speak of the Buddha as abandoning his wife Yaśodharā immediately after she gave birth to Rāhula, the Buddha’s only son. The Pāli Nikāyas, however, do not mention this story, and refer to Rāhula only as a young monk.

According to the Ariyapariyesanā-suttanta and the Mahāsaccaka-suttanta, the Buddha tried different spiritual paths for six years. First, he practiced yogic meditation under the guidance of Ālāra Kālāma and Uddaka Rāmaputta. After experiencing the states of concentration called base of nothingness and base of neither-perception-nor-non-perception, he realized that these lofty states did not lead to nirvana. Then the Buddha began to practice breathing exercises and fasting. The deterioration of his health led the Buddha to conclude that extreme asceticism was equally ineffective in attaining nirvana. He thus resumed eating solid food; after recovering his health, he began to practice a more moderate spiritual path, the middle path, which avoids the extremes of sensual self-indulgence and self-mortification. Soon after, the Buddha experienced enlightenment, or awakening, under a bodhi-tree. First he was inclined to inaction rather than to teaching what he had discovered. However, he changed his mind after the god Brahmā Sahampati asked him to teach. Out of compassion for all living beings, he decided to start a successful teaching career that lasted forty-five years.

d. Significance

It would be simplistic to dismiss all supernatural aspects of the Buddha’s life as false and consider historically true only those elements that are consistent with our contemporary scientific worldview. However, this approach towards the Buddha’s life was prevalent in the nineteenth century and a great part of the twentieth century. Today it is seen as problematic because it imposes modern western ideals of rationality onto non-western texts. Here I set aside the question of historical truth and speak exclusively of significance. The significance of all the biographies of Buddha does not lie in their historical accuracy, but rather in their effectiveness to convey basic Buddhist ideas and values throughout history. Even today, narratives about the many deeds of Buddha are successfully used to introduce Buddhists of all latitudes into the main values and teachings of Buddhism.

The supernatural elements of the Buddha’s life are as historically significant as the natural ones because they help to understand the way Buddhists conceived – and in many places continue to conceive – the Buddha. Like followers of other religious leaders, Buddhist scribes tended to glorify the sanctity of their foundational figure with extraordinary events and spectacular accomplishments. In this sense, the narratives of the Buddha are perhaps better understood as hagiographies rather than as biographies. The historical truth behind hagiographies is impossible to determine: how can we tell whether or not the Buddha was conceived without sexual intercourse; whether or not he was able to talk and walk right after his birth; whether or not he could walk over water, levitate, fly, and ascend into heaven at will? How do we know whether the Buddha was really tempted by Māra the evil one; whether there was an earthquake at the moment of his birth and death? The answers to these questions are a matter of faith. If the interpreter does not believe in the supernatural, then many narratives will be dismissed as historically false. However, for some Buddhists the supernatural events that appear in the life of Buddha did take place and are historically true.

The significance of the hagiographies of the Buddha is primarily ethical and spiritual. In fact, even if the life of Buddha did not take place as the hagiographies claim, the ethical values and the spiritual path they illustrate remain significant. Unlike other religions, the truth of Buddhism does not depend on the historicity of certain events in the life of the Buddha. Rather, the truth of Buddhism depends on the efficacy of the Buddhist path exemplified by the life of the Buddha and his disciples. In other words, if the different Buddhist paths inspired by the Buddha are useful to overcome existential dissatisfaction and suffering, then Buddhism is true regardless of the existence of the historical Buddha.

The fundamental ethical and spiritual point behind the Buddha’s life is that impermanent, conditioned, and contingent things such as wealth, social position, power, sensual pleasures, and even lofty meditative states, cannot generate a state of ultimate happiness. In order to overcome the profound existential dissatisfaction that all ephemeral and contingent things eventually generate, one needs to follow a comprehensive path of ethical and mental training conducive to the state of ultimate happiness called nirvana.

2. The Buddha’s Epistemology

a. The Extremes of Dogmatism and Skepticism

While the Buddha’s view of the spiritual path is traditionally described as a middle way between the extremes of self-indulgence and self-mortification, the Buddha’s epistemology can be interpreted as a middle way between the extremes of dogmatism and skepticism.

The extreme of dogmatism is primarily represented in the Pāli Nikāyas by Brahmanism. Brahmanism was a ritualistic religion that believed in the divine revelation of the Vedas, thought that belonging to a caste was determined by birth, and focused on the performance of sacrifice. Sacrifices involved the recitation of hymns taken from the Vedas and in many cases the ritual killing of animals.

Ritual sacrifices were offered to the Gods (gods for Buddhism) in exchange for prosperity, health, protection, sons, long life, and immortality. Only the male members of the highest caste, the priestly caste of Brahmins, could afford the professional space to seriously study the three Vedas (the Atharva Veda did not exist, or if it existed, it was not part yet of the Brahmanic tradition). Since only Brahmins knew the three Vedas, only they could recite the hymns necessary to properly perform the ritual sacrifice. Both ritual sacrifice and the social ethics of the caste system were seen as an expression of the cosmic order (Dharma) and as necessary to preserve that order.

Epistemologically speaking, Brahmanism emphasized the triple knowledge of the Vedas, and dogmatic faith in their content: “in regard to the ancient Brahmanic hymns that have come down through oral transmission and in the scriptural collections, the Brahmins come to the definite conclusion: ‘Only this is true, anything else is wrong’ ” (M.II.169).

The extreme of skepticism is represented in the Pāli Nikāyas by some members of the Śramanic movement, which consisted of numerous groups of spiritual seekers and wandering philosophers. The Sanskrit word “śramana” means “those who make an effort,” and probably refers to those who practice a spiritual discipline requiring individual effort, not just rituals performed by others. In order to become a śramana it was necessary to renounce one’s life as householder and enter into an itinerant life, which entailed the observance of celibacy and a simple life devoted to spiritual cultivation. Most śramanas lived in forests or in secluded places wandering from village to village where they preached and received alms in exchange.

The Śramanic movement was extremely diverse in terms of doctrines and practices. Most śramanas believed in free will as well as the efficacy of moral conduct and spiritual practices in order to attain liberation from the cycle of reincarnations. However, there was a minority of śramanas who denied the existence of the after life, free will, and the usefulness of ethical conduct and other spiritual practices. Probably as a reaction to these two opposite standpoints, some śramanas adopted a skeptic attitude denying the possibility of knowledge about such matters. Skeptics are described by the Buddha as replying questions by evasion (D.I.58-9), and as engaging in verbal wriggling, in eel-wriggling (amarāvikkhepa): “I don’t say it is like this. And I don’t say it is like that. And I don’t say it is otherwise. And I don’t say it is not so. And I don’t say it is not not so” (M.I. 521).

b. The Role of Personal Experience and the Buddha’s Wager

In contrast to Brahmanic dogmatism, the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas did not claim to be omniscient (M.I.482); in fact, he proposed a critical attitude toward all sources of knowledge. In the Majjhima Nikāya (II.170-1), the Buddha challenges Brahmins who accept Vedic scriptures out of faith (saddhā) and oral tradition (anussava); he compares those who blindly follow scripture and tradition without having direct knowledge of what they believe with “a file of blind men each in touch with the next: the first one does not see, the middle one does not see, and the last one does not see.” The Buddha also warns Brahmins against knowledge based on likeability or emotional inclination (ruci), reflection on reasons (ākāraparivitakka), and consideration of theories (diṭṭhinijjhānakkhanti). These five sources of knowledge may be either true or false; that is, they do not provide conclusive grounds to claim dogmatically that “only this is true, anything else is wrong.”

Dogmatic claims of truth were not the monopoly of Brahmins. In the Majjhima Nikāya (I.178), the Buddha uses the simile of the elephant footprint to question dogmatic statements about him, his teachings, and his disciples: he invites his followers to critically investigate all the available evidence (different types of elephant footprints and marks) until they know and see for themselves (direct perception of the elephant in the open). The Pāli Nikāyas also refer to many śramanas who hold dogmatic views and as a consequence are involved in heated doctrinal disputes. The conflict of dogmatic views is often described as “a thicket of views, a wilderness of views, a contortion of views, a vacillation of views, a fetter of views. It is beset by suffering, by vexation, by despair, and by fever, and it does not lead to disenchantment, to dispassion, to cessation, to peace, to higher knowledge, to enlightentment, to Nibbāna” (M.I.485).

Public debates were common and probably a good way to gain prestige and converts. Any reputed Brahmin or śramana had to have not only the ability to speak persuasively but also the capacity to argue well. Rational argument played an important role in justifying doctrines and avoiding defeat in debate, which implied conversion to the other’s teaching. At the time of the Buddha many of these debates seem to have degenerated into dialectical battles that diverted from spiritual practice and led to disorientation, anger, and frustration. Although the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas utilizes reasoning to justify his positions in debates and conversations with others, he discourages dogmatic attachment to doctrines including his own (see the simile of the raft, M.I.135), and the use of his teachings for the sake of criticizing others and for winning debates (M.I.132).

Unlike the skepticism of some śramanas, the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas takes clear stances on ethical and spiritual issues, and rejects neither the existence of right views (M.I.46-63) nor the possibility of knowing certain things as they are (yathābhūtaṃ). In order to counteract skepticism, the Buddha advises to the Kālāma people “not go by oral tradition, by succession of disciples, by hearsay, by the content of sacred scripture, by logical consistency, by inference, by reflection on reasons, by consideration of theories, by appearance, by respect to a teacher.” Instead, the Buddha recommends knowing things for oneself as the ultimate criterion to adjudicate between conflicting claims of truth (A.I.189).

When personal experience is not available to someone, the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas proposes taking into account what is praised or censored by the wise, as well as a method to calculate the benefits of following certain opinions called the incontrovertible teaching (apaṇṇakadhamma), which, in some ways, resembles Pascal’s wager. According to the incontrovertible teaching, it would be better to believe in certain doctrines because they produce more benefits than others. For instance, even if there is no life after death and if good actions do not produce good consequences, still a moral person is praised in this life by the wise, whereas the immoral person is censured by society. However, if there is life after death and good action produce happy consequences, a moral person is praised in this life, and after death he or she goes to heaven. On the contrary, the immoral person is censured in this life, and after death he or she goes to hell (M.I.403). Therefore, it is better to believe that moral actions produce good consequences even if we do not have personal experience of karma and rebirth.

c. Interpretations of the Buddha’s Advice to the Kālāma People

Some have interpreted the Buddha’s advice to the Kālāma people as an iconoclast rejection of tradition and faith. This, however, does little justice to the Pāli Nikāyas, where the Buddha is said to be part of a long and respectable tradition of past Buddhas, and where the first Brahmins are sometimes commended by their holiness. The Buddha shows respect for many traditional beliefs and practices of his time, and rejects only those that are unjustified, useless, or conducive to suffering for oneself and others.

Faith in the Buddha, his teachings, and his disciples, is highly regarded in the Pāli Nikāyas: it is the first of the five factors of striving (M.II.95-6), and a necessary condition to practice the spiritual path (M.III.33). Buddhist faith, however, is not unconditional or an end in and of itself but rather a means towards direct knowledge that must be based on critical examination, supported by reasons, and eventually verified or rooted in vision (dassanamūlikā) (M.I.320).

Another common interpretation of the advice to the Kālāmas is that for the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas only personal experience provides reliable knowledge. However, this is misleading because analogical and inferential reasoning are widely used by the Buddha and his disciples to teach others as well as in debates with non-Buddhists. Similarly, analytical or philosophical meditation is a common practice for the attainment of liberation through wisdom. Personal experience, like any other means of knowledge is to be critically examined. Except in the case of Buddhas and liberated beings, personal experience is always tainted by affective and cognitive prejudices.

The Pāli Nikāyas might give the first impression of endorsing a form of naïve or direct realism: that is, the Buddha and his disciples seem to think that the world is exactly as we perceive it to be. While it is true that the Pāli Nikāyas do not question the common sense connection between objects of knowledge and the external world, there are some texts that might support a phenomenalist reading. For instance, the Buddha defines the world as the six senses (five ordinary senses plus the mind) and their respective objects (S.IV.95), or as the six senses, the six objects, and the six types of consciousness that arise in dependence on them (S.IV.39-40).

Here, the epistemology of the Buddha is a special form of realism that allows both for the direct perception of reality and the constructions of those less realized. Only Buddhas and liberated beings perceive the world directly; that is, they see the Dharma, whose regularity and stability remains independent of the existence of Buddhas (S.II.25). Unenlightened beings, on the other hand, see the world indirectly through a veil of negative emotions and erroneous views. Some texts go so far as to suggest that the world is not simply seen indirectly, but rather that it is literally constructed by our emotional dispositions. For instance, in the Majjhima Nikāya (I.111), the Buddha explicitly states that “what one feels, one perceives” (Yaṃ vedeti, taṃ sañjānāti). That is, our knowledge is formed by our feelings. The influence of feelings in our ways of knowing can also be inferred from the twelve-link chain of dependent arising, which explains the arising and cessation of suffering. The second link, saṅkhāra, or formations, conditions the arising of the third link, consciousness. The term saṅkhāra literally means “put together,” connoting the constructive role of the mental factors that fall into this category, many of them affective in nature.

Similarly, the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas says that “with what one has mentally constructed as the root cause (Yaṃ papañceti tato nidānaṃ), perceptions, concepts, and [further] mental constructions (papañcasaññāsaṅkhā) beset a man with respect to past, future, and present forms…sounds…odours…flavors…tangibles…mind-objects cognizable by the eye…ear… nose…tongue…body…mind” (M.I.111-112). That is, the knowledge of unenlightened beings has papañca, or mental constructions, as its root cause. The word papañca is a technical term that literally means diversification or proliferation; it refers to the tendency of unenlightened minds to construct or fabricate concepts conducive to suffering, especially essentialist and ego-related concepts such as “I” and “mine,” concepts which lead to a variety of negative mental states such as craving, conceit, and dogmatic views about the self (Ñāṇananda 1971).

It is precisely because our experiences are affectively and cognitively conditioned that the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas advocates a critical approach toward all sources of knowledge, including personal experience. Even the lofty experiences derived from meditation are to be analyzed carefully because they might lead to false opinions about the nature of the self, the world, and the after life. The epistemological ideal is to know things directly beyond mental constructions (papañca), which presupposes the “tranquilization of all mental formations” (sabbasaṅkhārasamatha).

d. Higher Knowledge and the Question of Empiricism

Contemplative experiences are of two main types: meditative absorptions or abstractions (jhāna), and higher or direct knowledge (abhiññā). There are six classes of higher or direct knowledge: the first one refers to a variety of supernatural powers including levitation and walking on water; in this sense, it is better understood as a know-how type of knowledge. The second higher knowledge is literally called “divine ear element” or clairaudience. The third higher knowledge is usually translated as telepathy, though it means simply the ability to know the underlying mental state of others, not the reading of their minds and thoughts.

The next three types of higher knowledge are especially important because they were experienced by the Buddha the night of his enlightenment, and because they are the Buddhist counterparts to the triple knowledge of the Vedas. The fourth higher knowledge is retrocognition or knowledge of past lives, which entails a direct experience of the process of rebirth. The fifth is the divine eye or clairvoyance; that is, direct experience of the process of karma, or as the texts put it, the passing away and reappearing of beings in accordance with their past actions. The sixth is knowledge of the destruction of taints, which implies experiential knowledge of the four noble truths and the process of liberation.

Some scholars have interpreted the Buddha’s emphasis on direct experience and the verifiable nature of Buddhist faith as a form of radical empiricism (Kalupahana 1992), and logical empiricism (Jayatilleke 1963). According to the empiricist interpretation, Buddhist faith is always subsequent to critically verifying the available empirical evidence. All doctrines taught by the Buddha are empirically verifiable if one takes the time and effort to attain higher or direct knowledge, interpreted as extraordinary sense experience. For instance, the triple knowledge of enlightenment implies a direct experience of the processes of karma, rebirth, and the four noble truths. Critiques of the empiricist interpretation point out that, at least at the beginning of the path, Buddhist faith is not always based on empirical evidence, and that the purpose of extraordinary knowledge is not to verify the doctrines of karma, rebirth, and the four noble truths (Hoffman 1982, 1987).

Whether or not the Buddha’s epistemology can be considered empiricist depends on what we mean by empiricism and experience. The opposition between rationalism and empiricism and the sharp distinction between senses and reason is foreign to Buddhism. Nowhere in the Pāli Nikāyas does the Buddha say that all knowledge begins in or is acquired from sense experience. In this sense, the Buddha is not an empiricist.

3. The Buddha’s Cosmology and Metaphysics

a. The Universe and the Role of Gods

The Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas accepts the cosmology characteristic of his cultural context: a universe with several realms of existence, where people are reborn and die again and again (saṃsāra) depending on their past actions (karma) until they attain salvation (mokṣa). However, the Buddha substantially modifies the cosmology of his time. Against the Brahmanic tendency to understand karma as ritual action, and the Jain claim that all activities including involuntary actions constitute karma, the Buddha defines karma in terms of volition, or free will, which is expressed through thoughts, words, and behavior. That is, for the Buddha, only voluntary actions produce karma.

Another important modification is that for the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas, saṃsāra refers primarily to a psychophysical process that takes place within the physical universe. For instance, when the Buddha speaks about the end of the world, he says that it cannot be reached by traveling through the physical universe, but only by putting an end to suffering (saṃsāra), where “one is not born, does not age, does not die, does not pass away, and is not reborn” Accordingly, salvation is not understood in world-denying terms or as an escape from the physical universe, but rather as an inner transformation that takes place within one’s own psychophysical organism: “It is, friend, in just this fathom-high carcass endowed with perception and mind that I make known the world, the origin of the world, the cessation of the world, and the way leading to the cessation of the world.” (S.I.62; A.II.47-9).

There are five kinds of destinations within saṃsāra: hell, animal kingdom, realm of ghosts, humankind, and realm of devas or radiant beings, commonly translated as gods (M.I.73). There are many hells and heavens and life there is transitory, just as in other destinations. In some traditions there is another destination, the realm of asuras or demigods, who are jealous of the gods and who are always in conflict with them.

The Pāli Nikāyas further divide the universe of saṃsāra into three main planes of existence, each one subdivided into several realms. The three planes of existence are sensorial, fine-material, and immaterial (M.I.50). Most destinations belong to the sensorial realm. Only a minority of heavens belong to the fine-material and immaterial realms. Rebirth in a particular realm depends on past actions: good actions lead to good destinations and bad actions to bad rebirths. Rebirth as a human or in heaven is considered a good destination; rebirth in the realm of ghosts, hell, and the animal realm are bad. Human rebirth is extremely difficult to attain (S.V.455-6; M.III.169), and it is highly regarded because of its unique combination of pain and pleasure, as well as its unique conductivity for attaining enlightenment. In this last sense human rebirth is said to be even better than rebirth as a god.

Rebirth also depends on the prevalent mental states of a person during life, and especially at the moment of death. That is, there is a correlation between mental states and realms of rebirth, between cosmology and psychology. For instance, a mind where hatred and anger prevails is likely to be reborn in hell; deluded and uncultivated minds are headed toward the animal kingdom; someone obsessed with sex and food will probably become bound to earth as a ghost; loving and caring persons will be reborn in heaven; someone who frequently dwells in meditative absorptions will be reborn in the fine-material and immaterial realms. Human rebirth might be the consequence of any of the aforementioned mental states.

Perhaps the most important modification the Buddha introduces into the traditional cosmology of his time was a new view of Gods (gods within Buddhism). In the Pāli Nikāyas, gods do not play any significant cosmological role. For the Buddha, the universe has not been created by an all-knowing, all-powerful god that is the lord of the universe and father of all beings (M.I.326-7). Rather, the universe evolves following certain cyclic patterns of contraction and expansion (D.III.84-5).

Similarly, the cosmic order, or Dharma, does not depend on the will of gods, and there are many good deeds far more effective than ritual sacrifices offered to the gods (D.I144ff). Gods for the Buddha are unenlightened beings subject to birth and death that require further learning and spiritual practice in order to attain liberation; they are more powerful and spiritually more developed than humans and other living beings, but Buddhas excel them in all regards: spiritual development, wisdom, and power. Even the supreme type of god, Brahmā, offers his respects to the Buddha, praises him, and asks him to preach the Dharma for those with little dust in their eyes (M.I.168-9).

Since the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas does not deny the existence of gods, only their cosmological and soteriological functions, it is inaccurate to define early Buddhism as atheistic or as non-theistic. The word atheistic is usually associated with anti-religious attitudes absent in the Buddha, and the term non-theistic seems to imply that rejecting the theistic concept of God is one of the main concerns of the Buddha, when in fact it is a marginal question in the Pāli Nikāyas.

b. The Four Noble Truths or Realities

One the most common frameworks to explain the basic teachings of early Buddhism is the four noble truths (ariyasacca, Sanskrit āryasatya). The word sacca means both truth and reality. The word ariya refers primarily to the ideal type of person the Buddhist path is supposed to generate, a noble person in the ethical and spiritual sense. Translating ariyasacca by ‘noble truths’ is somehow misleading because it gives the wrong impression of being a set of beliefs, a creed that Buddhists accept as noble and true. The four noble truths are primarily four realities whose contemplation leads to sainthood or the state of the noble ones (ariya). Other possible translations of ariyasacca are “ennobling truths” or “truths of the noble ones.”

Each noble truth requires a particular practice from the disciple; in this sense the four noble truths can be understood as four types of practice. The first noble truth, or the reality of suffering, assigns to the disciple the practice of cultivating understanding. Such understanding takes place gradually through reflection, analytical meditation, and eventually direct experience. What needs to be understood is the nature of suffering, and the different types of suffering and happiness within saṃsāra.

A common misconception about the first noble truth is to think that it presupposes a pessimistic outlook on life. This interpretation would be correct only if the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas had not taught the existence of different types of happiness and the third noble truth, or cessation of suffering; that is, the good news about the reality of nirvana, defined as the highest happiness (Dhp.203; M.I.505). Since the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas teaches the reality of both suffering and the highest happiness, perhaps it is more accurate to speak of his attitude as realist: there is a problem but there is also a solution to that problem.

The second noble truth, or reality of the origin of suffering, calls for the practice of renunciation to all mental states that generate suffering for oneself and others. The mental state that appears in the second noble truth is taṇhā, literally “thirst.” It was customary in the first Western translations of Buddhist texts (Burnouf, Fausboll, Muller, Oldenberg, Warren) to translate taṇhā by desire. This translation has misled many to think that the ultimate goal of Buddhists is the cessation of all desires. However, as Damien Keown puts it, “it is an oversimplification of the Buddhist position to assume that it seeks an end to all desire.” (1992: 222).

In fact, there are many terms in the Pāli Nikāyas that can be translated as desire, not all of them related to mental states conducive to suffering. On the contrary, there are many texts in the Pāli Nikāyas that demonstrate the positive role of certain types of desire in the Buddha’s path (Webster, 2005: 90-142). Nonetheless, the term taṇhā in the Pāli Nikāyas designates always a harmful type of desire that leads to “repeated existence” (ponobhavikā), is “associated with delight and lust” (nandirāgasahagatā), and “delights here and there” (tatra tatrābhinandinī) (M.I.48; D.II.308; etc). There is only one text (Nettipakaraṇa 87) that speaks about a wholesome type of taṇhā that leads to its own relinquishment, but this text is extra-canonical except in Myanmar.

The most common translation of taṇhā nowadays is craving. Unlike the loaded, vast, and ambivalent term desire, the term craving refers more specifically to a particular type of desire, and cannot be misinterpreted as conveying any want and aspiration whatsoever. Rather, like taṇhā in the Pāli Nikāyas, craving refers to intense (rāga can be translated by both lust and passion), obsessive, and addictive desires (the idiom tatra tatra can also be interpreted as connoting the idea of repetition or tendency to repeat itself).

Since craving, or taṇhā, does not include all possible types of desires, there is no “paradox of desire” in the Pāli Nikāyas. In other words, the Buddha of the the Pāli Nikāyas does not teach that in order to attain liberation from suffering one has to paradoxically desire to stop all desires. There is no contradiction in willing the cessation of craving. That is, for the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas it is possible to want, like, or strive for something without simultaneously craving for it.

The Pāli Nikāyas distinguish between three kinds of taṇhā: craving for sensual pleasures (kāmataṇhā), craving for existence (bhavataṇhā), and craving for non-existence (vibhavataṇhā). Following Webster, I understand the last two types of craving as “predicated on two extreme (wrong) views, those of eternalism and annihilationism” (2005:130-1). In other words, craving for existence longs for continued existence of one’s self within saṃsāra, and craving for non-existence is a reversed type of desire or aversion to one’s own destruction at the moment of death.

The underlying root of all suffering, however, is not craving but spiritual ignorance (avijjā). In the Pāli Nikāyas spiritual ignorance does not connote a mere lack of information but rather a misconception, a distorted perception of things under the influence of conceptual fabrications and affective prejudices. More specifically, ignorance refers to not knowing things as they are, the Dharma, and the four noble truths. The relinquishing of spiritual ignorance, craving, and the three roots of the unwholesome (greed or lobha, aversion or dosa, delusion or moha) entails the cultivation of many positive mental states, some of the most prominent in the Pāli Nikāyas being: wisdom or understanding (paññā), letting go (anupādāna), selflessness (alobha), love (avera, adosa, avyāpāda), friendliness (mettā), compassion (karuṇā), altruistic joy (muditā), equanimity (upekkhā), calm (samatha, passaddhi), mindfulness (sati), diligence (appamāda).

The third noble truth, or reality of the cessation of suffering, asks us to directly realize the destruction of suffering, usually expressed with a variety of cognitive and affective terms: peace, higher knowledge, the tranquilization of mental formations, the abandonment of all grasping, cessation, the destruction of craving, absence of lust, nirvana (Pali nibbāna). The most popular of all the terms that express the cessation of suffering and rebirth is nirvana, which literally means blowing out or extinguishing.

Metaphorically, the extinction of nirvana designates a mental event, namely, the extinguishing of the fires of craving, aversion, and delusion (S.IV.251). That nirvana primarily denotes a mental event, a psychological process, is also confirmed by many texts that describe the person who experiences nirvana with intransitive verbs such as to nirvanize (nibbāyati) or to parinirvanize (parinibbāyati). However, there are a few texts that seem to indicate that nirvana might also be a domain of perception (āyatana), element (dhātu), or reality (dhamma) known at the moment of enlightenment, and in special meditative absorptions after enlightenment. This domain is usually defined as having the opposite qualities of saṃsāra (Ud 8.1), or with metaphoric expressions (S.IV.369ff).

What is important to point out is that the concern of the Pāli Nikāyas is not to describe nirvana, which, strictly speaking, is beyond logic and language (It 37), but rather to provide a systematic explanation of the arising and cessation of suffering. The goal of Buddhism as it appears in the Pāli Nikāyas does not consist in believing that suffering arises and ceases like the Buddha says, but in realizing that what he teaches about suffering and its cessation is the case; that is, the Buddha’s teaching, or Dharma, is intended to be experienced by the wise for themselves (M.I.265).

The fourth noble truth, or reality of the path leading to the cessation of suffering, imposes on us the practice of developing the eightfold ennobling path. This path can be understood either as eight mental factors that are cultivated by ennobled disciples at the moment of liberation, or as different parts of the entire Buddhist path whose practice ennoble the disciple gradually. The eight parts of the Buddhist path are usually divided into three kinds of training: training in wisdom (right view and right intention), ethical training (right speech, right bodily conduct, and right livelihood), and training in concentration (right effort, right mindfulness and right concentration).

c. Ontology of Suffering: the Five Aggregates

A prominent concern of the Buddha in the Pāli Nikāyas is to provide a solution to the problem of suffering. When asked about his teachings, the Buddha answers that he only teaches suffering and its cessation (M.I.140). The first noble truth describes what the Buddha means by suffering: birth, aging, illness, death, union with what is displeasing, separation from what is pleasing, not getting what one wants, the five aggregates of grasping (S.V.421).

The original Pali term for suffering is dukkha, a word that ordinarily means physical and mental pain, but that in the first noble truth designates diverse kinds of frustration, and the existential angst generated by the impermanence of life and the unavoidability of old age, disease, and death. However, when the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas mentions birth and the five aggregates of grasping, he seems to be referring to the fact that our psychophysical components are conditioned by grasping, and consequently, within saṃsāra, the cycle of births and deaths. This interpretation is consistent with later Buddhist tradition, which speaks about three types of dukkha: ordinary suffering (mental and physical pain), suffering due to change (derived from the impermanence of things), and suffering due to conditions (derived from being part of saṃsāra).

When the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas speaks about personal identity and the human predicament, he uses the technical expression “five aggregates of grasping” (pañcupādānakkhandhā). That is, the Buddha describes human existence in terms of five groups of constituents. The five aggregates are: material form (rūpa), sensations (vedanā), perceptions (saññā), mental formations (saṃkhāra), consciousness (viññāṇa). While the first aggregate refers to material components, the other four designate a variety of mental functions.

The aggregate material form is explained as the four great elements and the shape or figure of our physical body. The four great elements are earth, water, fire, and air. The earth element is further defined as whatever is solid in our body, and water as whatever is liquid. The fire element refers to “that by which one is warmed, ages, and is consumed,” and the process of digestion. The air element denotes the breathing process and movements of gas throughout the body (M.I.185ff).

The aggregate sensations denote pleasant, unpleasant and neutral feelings experienced after there is contact between the six sense organs (eye, ear, nose, tongue, body, and mind) and their six objects (forms, sounds, odors, tastes, tangible objects, and mental phenomena). The aggregate perceptions express the mental function by which someone is able to identify objects. There are six types of perceptions corresponding to the six objects of the senses. The aggregate formations express emotional and intellectual dispositions, literally volitions (sañcetanâ), towards the six objects of the senses. These dispositions are the result of past cognitive and affective conditioning, that is, past karma or past voluntary actions. The aggregate consciousness connotes the ability to know and to be aware of the six objects of the senses (S.III.59ff).

d. Arguments for the Doctrine of Non-self

The Buddha reiterates again and again throughout the Pāli Nikāyas that any of the five aggregates “whether past, future or present, internal or external, gross or subtle, inferior or superior, far or near, ought to be seen as it actually is with right wisdom thus: ‘this is not mine, this I am not, this is not my self.’ ” When the disciple contemplates the five aggregates in this way, he or she becomes disenchanted (nibbindati), lust fades away (virajjati), and he or she attains liberation due to the absence of lust (virāgā vimuccati) (M.I.138-9).

The Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas justifies this view of the five aggregates as non-self with three main arguments, which are used as a method of analytical meditation, and in polemics with members of other schools. The assumption underlying the Buddha’s arguments is that something might be considered a self only if it were permanent, not leading to suffering, not dependently arisen, and subject to one’s own will. Since none of the five aggregates fulfill any of these conditions, it is wrong to see them as belonging to us or as our self.

In the first and most common argument for non-self the Buddha asks someone the following questions: “What do you think, monks, is material form permanent or impermanent?” – “Impermanent, venerable sir.” – “Is what is impermanent suffering or happiness?” – “Suffering, venerable sir.” –Is what is impermanent, suffering, and subject to change, fit to be regarded as: “this is mine, this I am, this is my self?” – “No, venerable sir” (M.I.138, etc). The same reasoning is applied to the other aggregates.

The first argument is also applied to the six sensual organs, the six objects, the six types of consciousness, perceptions, sensations, and formations that arise dependent on the contact between the senses and their objects (M.III.278ff). Sometimes the first argument for non-self is applied to the six senses and their objects without questions and answers: “Monks, the visual organ is impermanent. What is impermanent is suffering. What is suffering is non-self. What is non-self ought to be seen as it really is with right wisdom thus: ‘this is not mine, this I am not, this is not my self’ ” (S.IV.1ff).

The second argument for non-self is much less frequent: “Monks, material form is non-self. If it were self, it would not lead to affliction. It would be possible [to say] with regard to material form: ‘Let my material form be thus. Let my material form not be thus.’ But precisely because it is non-self, it leads to affliction. And it is not possible [to say] with regard to material form: ‘Let my material form be thus. Let my material form not be thus’ ”(S.III.66-7). The same reasoning is applied to the other four aggregates.

The third argument deduces non-self from that fact that physical and mental phenomena depend on certain causes to exist. For instance, in (M.III.280ff), the Buddha first analyzes the dependent arising of physical and mental phenomena. Then he argues: “If anyone says: ‘the visual organ is self,’ that is unacceptable. The rising and falling of the visual organ are fully known (paññāyati). Since the rising and falling of the visual organ are fully known, it would follow that: ‘my self arises and falls.’ Therefore, it is unacceptable to say: ‘the visual organ is self.’ Thus the visual organ is non-self.” The same reasoning is applied to the other senses, their objects, and the six types of consciousness, contacts (meeting of sense, object and consciousness), sensations, and cravings derived from them.

The third argument also appears combined with the first one without questions and answers. For instance, in (A.V.188), it is said that “whatever becomes, that is conditioned, volitionally formed, dependently arisen, that is impermanent. What is impermanent, that is suffering. What is suffering, that is [to be regarded thus]: ‘this is not mine, this I am not, this is not my self.’ ”

If something can be inferred from these three arguments, it is that the target of the doctrine of non-self is not all concepts of self but specifically views of the self as permanent and not dependently arisen. That is, the doctrine of non-self opposes what is technically called “views of personal identity” or more commonly translated “personality views” (sakkāyadiṭṭhi). Views of personal identity relate the five aggregates to a permanent and independent self in four ways: as being identical, as being possession of the self, as being in the self, or as the self being in them (M.I.300ff). All these views of personal identity are said to be the product of spiritual ignorance, that is, of not seeing with right wisdom the true nature of the five aggregates, their origin, their cessation, and the way leading to their cessation.

e. Human Identity and the Meaning of Non-self

Since the Pāli Nikāyas accept the common sense usages of the word “self” (attan, Skt. ātman), primarily in idiomatic expressions and as a reflexive pronoun meaning “oneself,” the doctrine of non-self does not imply a literal negation of the self. Similarly, since the Buddha explicitly criticizes views that reject karma and moral responsibility (M.I.404ff), the doctrine of non-self should not be understood as the absolute rejection of moral agency and any concept of personal identity. In fact, the Buddha explicitly defines “personal identity” (sakkāya) as the five aggregates (M.I.299).

Since the sixth sense, or mind, includes the four mental aggregates, and since the ordinary five senses and their objects fall under the aggregate of material form, it can be said that for the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas personal identity is defined not only in terms of the five aggregates, but also in terms of the six senses and their six objects.

If the meaning of non-self were that there is literally no self whatsoever, no personal identity and no moral agency whatsoever, then the only logical conclusion would be to state that the Buddha taught nonsense and that the Pāli Nikāyas are contradictory, sometimes accepting the existence of a self and other times rejecting it. Even though no current scholar of Buddhism would endorse such an interpretation of non-self, it is still popular in some missionary circles and apologetic literature.

A more sympathetic interpretation of non-self distinguishes between two main levels of discourse (Collins 1982). The first level of discourse does not question the concept of self and freely uses personal terms and expressions in accordance with ordinary language and social conventions. The second level of discourse is philosophically more sophisticated and rejects views of self and personal identity as permanent and not dependently arisen. Behind the second level of discourse there is a technical understanding of the self and personal identity as the five aggregates, that is, as a combination of psychophysical processes, all of them impermanent and dependently originated.

This concept of the self as permanent and not dependently arisen is problematic because it is based on a misperception of the aggregates. This misperception of the five aggregates is associated with what is technically called “the conceit I am” (asmimāna) and “the underlying tendency to the conceits ‘I’ and ‘mine’ ” (ahaṃkāra-mamaṅkāra-mānānusaya). This combination of conceit and ignorance fosters different types of cravings, especially craving for immortal existence, and subsequently, speculations about the past, present, and future nature of the self and personal identity. For instance, in (D.I.30ff), the Buddha speaks of different ascetics and Brahmins who claim that the self after death is “material, immaterial, both material and immaterial, neither material nor immaterial, finite, infinite, both, neither, of uniform perception, of varied perception, of limited perception, of unlimited perception, wholly happy, wholly miserable, both, neither.” The doctrine of non-self is primarily intended to counteract views of the self and personal identity rooted in ignorance regarding the nature of the five aggregates, the conceit “I am,” and craving for immortal existence.

A minority of scholars reject the notion that the Buddha’s doctrine of non-self implies the negation of the true self, which for them is permanent and independent of causes and conditions. Accordingly, the purpose of the doctrine of non-self is simply to deny that the five aggregates are the true self. The main reason for this interpretation is that the Buddha does not say anywhere in the Pāli Nikāyas that the self does not exist; he only states that a self and what belongs to a self are not apprehended (M.I.138). Therefore, for these interpreters the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas only claims that impermanent and conditioned things like the five aggregates are not the true self. For these scholars, the Buddha does talk about the true self when he speaks about the consciousness of liberated beings (M.I.140), and the unconditioned, unborn and deathless nirvana (Bhattacarya 1973; Pérez Remón 1981).

However, the majority of Buddhist scholars agree with the traditional Buddhist self-understanding: they think that the doctrine of non-self is incompatible with any doctrine about a permanent and independent self, not just with views that mistakenly identify an alleged true self with the five aggregates. The main reason for this interpretation relates to the doctrine of dependent arising.

f. Causality and the Principle of Dependent Arising

The importance of dependent arising (paṭiccasamuppāda) cannot be underestimated: the Buddha realized its workings during the night of his enlightenment (M.I.167). Preaching the doctrine of dependent arising amounts to preaching the Dharma (M.II.32), and whoever sees it sees the Dharma (M.I.191). The Dharma of dependent arising remains valid whether or not there are Buddhas in the world (S.II.25), and it is through not understanding it that people are trapped into the cycle of birth and death (D.II.55).

The doctrine of dependent arising can be formulated in two ways that usually appear together: as a general principle or as a chain of causal links to explain the arising and ceasing of suffering and the process of rebirth. The general principle of dependent arising states that “when this exists, that comes to be; with the arising of this, that arises. When this does not exist, that does not come to be; with the cessation of this, that ceases” (M.II.32; S.II.28).

Unlike the logical principle of conditionality, the principle of dependent arising does not designate a connection between two ideas but rather an ontological relationship between two things or events within a particular timeframe. Dependent arising expresses not only the Buddha’s understanding of causality but also his view of things as interrelated. The point behind dependent arising is that things are dependent on specific conditions (paṭicca), and that they arise together with other things (samuppāda). In other words, the principle of dependent arising conveys both ontological conditionality and the constitutive relativity of things. This relativity, however, does not mean that for the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas everything is interdependent or that something is related to everything else. This is a later development of Buddhist thought, not a characteristic of early Indian Buddhism.

The most comprehensive chain of dependent arising contains twelve causal links: (1) ignorance, (2) formations, (3) consciousness, (4) mentality-materiality, (5) the six senses, (6) contact, (7) sensations, (8) craving (9) grasping, (10) becoming, (11) birth, (12) old age and death. The most common formulation is as follows: with 1 as a condition 2 [comes to be]; with 2 as a condition 3 [comes to be], and so forth. Conversely, with the cessation of 1 comes the cessation of 2; with the cessation of 2 comes the cessation of 3, and so forth.

It is important to keep in mind that this chain does not imply a linear understanding of causality where the antecedent link disappears once the subsequent link has come to be. Similarly, each of the causal links is not to be understood as the one and only cause that produces the next link but rather as the most necessary condition for its arising. For instance, ignorance, the first link, is not the only cause of the process of suffering but rather the cause most necessary for the continuation of such a process. For the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas, as well as for later Buddhist tradition, there is always a multiplicity of causes and conditions at play.

The traditional interpretation divides the twelve link chain of dependent arising into three lives. The first two links (ignorance and formations) belong to the past life: due to a misperception of the nature of the five aggregates, a person (the five aggregates) performs voluntary actions: mental, verbal, and bodily actions, with wholesome, unwholesome, and neutral karmic effects. The next ten factors correspond to the present life: the karmic effects of past voluntary formations are stored in consciousness and transferred to the next life. Consciousness together with the other mental aggregates combines with a new physical body to constitute a new psychophysical organism (mentality-materiality). This new stage of the five aggregates develops the six senses and the ability to establish contact with their six objects. Contacts with objects of the senses produce pleasant, unpleasant and neutral sensations. If the sensations are pleasant, the person usually responds with cravings for more pleasant experiences, and if the sensations are unpleasant, with aversion. Craving and aversion, as well as the underlying ignorance of the nature of the five aggregates are fundamental causes of suffering and rebirth: the three roots of the unwholesome according to the Pāli Nikāyas, or the three mental poisons according to later Buddhist traditions.

By repeating the affective responses of craving and aversion, the person becomes more and more dependent on whatever leads to more pleasant sensations and less unpleasant ones. This creates a variety of emotional dependencies and a tendency to grasp or hold onto what causes pleasure and avoids pain. The Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas speaks about four types of grasping: towards sensual pleasures, views, rites-and-observances, and especially towards doctrines of a [permanent and independent] self (D.II.57-8).

The original term for grasping is upādāna, which also designates the fuel or supply necessary to maintain a fire. In this sense, grasping is the psychological fuel that maintains the fires of craving, aversion, and delusion, the fires whose extinction is called nirvana. The Buddha’s ideal of letting go and detachment should not be misunderstood as the absence of any emotions whatsoever including love and compassion, but specifically as the absence of emotions associated with craving, aversion, and delusion. Motivated by grasping and the three mental fires, the five aggregates perform further voluntary actions, whose karmic effects perpetuate existence within the cycle of rebirth and subsequent suffering. The last two links (birth, aging and death) refer to the future life. At the end of this present existence, a new birth of the five aggregates will take place followed by old age, death, and other kinds of suffering.

The twelve-link chain of dependent arising explains the processes of rebirth and suffering without presupposing a permanent and independent self. The Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas makes this point explicit in his passionate rebuttal of the monk Sāti, who claimed that it is the same consciousness that wanders through the cycle of rebirth. For the Buddha, consciousness, like the other eleven causal links, is dependent on specific conditions (M.I.258ff), which entails that consciousness is impermanent, suffering, and non-self.

Instead of a permanent and independent self behind suffering and the cycle of rebirth, the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas presupposes five psychophysical sets of processes, namely, the five aggregates, which imply an impermanent and dependently-arisen concept of ‘self’ and ‘personal identity.’ In other words, the Buddha rejects substance-selves but accepts process-selves (Gowans 2003). Yet, the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas explicitly refuses to use personal terms such as ‘self’ in technical explanations of rebirth and suffering, and he prefers to speak in terms of causes and conditions that produce other causes and conditions (S.II.13-4; S.II.62; M.III.19). But what happens to consciousness and the other aggregates when grasping no longer exists and the three mental fires have been extinguished? What happens when suffering ceases and the cycle of rebirth stops?

4. Nirvana and the Silence of the Buddha

a. Two Kinds of Nirvana and the Undetermined Questions

When the fires of craving, aversion, and ignorance are extinguished at the moment of enlightenment, the aggregates are liberated due to the lack of grasping. This is technically called nirvana with remainder of grasping (saupādisesa-nibbāna), or as later tradition puts it, nirvana of mental defilements (kilesa-parinibbāna). The expression ‘remainder of grasping’ refers to the five aggregates of liberated beings, which continue to live after enlightenment but without negative mental states.

The aggregates of the liberated beings perform their respective functions and, like the aggregates of anybody else, they grow old, get sick, and are subject to pleasant and unpleasant sensations until death. The difference between unenlightened and enlightened beings is that enlightened beings respond to sensations without craving or aversion, and with higher knowledge of the true nature of the five aggregates.

The definition of nirvana without remainder (anupādisesa-nibbāna) that appears in (It 38) only says that for the liberated being “all that is experienced here and now, without enchantment [another term for grasping], will be cooled (sīta).” Since “all” is defined in the Pāli Nikāyas as the six senses and their six objects (S.IV.15), which is another way of describing the individual psychophysical experience or the five aggregates, the expression “all that is experienced” refers to what happens to the aggregates of liberated beings. Since (It 38) explicitly uses the expression “here and now” (idheva), it seems impossible to conclude that the definition of nirvana without remainder is intended to say anything about nirvana or the aggregates beyond death. Rather (It 38) describes nirvana and the aggregates at the moment of death: they will be no longer subject to rebirth and they will become cooled, tranquil, at peace. The question is: what does this peace or coolness entail? What happens after the nirvana of the aggregates? Does the mind of enlightened beings survive happily ever after? Does the liberated being exist beyond death or not?

These questions are left undetermined (avyākata) by the Buddha of the the Pāli Nikāyas. The ten questions in the the Pāli Nikāyas ask whether (1) The world is eternal; (2) The world is not eternal; (3) The world is infinite; (4) The world is finite; (5) Body and soul are one thing; (6) Body and soul are two different things; (7) A liberated being (tathāgata) exists after death; (8) A liberated being (tathāgata) does not exist after death; (9) A liberated being (tathāgata) both exists and does not exist after death; (10) A liberated being (tathāgata) neither exists nor does not exist after death. In Sanskrit Buddhist texts the ten views become fourteen by adding the last two possibilities of the tetralema (both A and B, neither A nor B) to the questions about the world.

Unfortunately for those looking for quick answers, the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas does not provide a straightforward yes or no response to any of these questions. When the Buddha is asked whether the liberated being exists, does not exist, both, or neither, he sets aside these questions by saying that (1) he does not hold such views, (2) he has left the questions undetermined, and (3) the questions do not apply (na upeti). The first two answers are also used to respond to questions about the temporal and spatial finitude or infinitude of the world, and the identity or difference between the soul and the body. Only the third type of answer is given to the questions about liberated beings after death.

Most presentations of early Buddhism interpret these three answers of the Buddha as an eloquent silence about metaphysical questions due primarily to pragmatic reasons, namely, the questions divert from spiritual practice and are not conducive to liberation from suffering. While the pragmatic reasons for the answers of the Buddha are undeniable, it is inaccurate to understand them as silence about metaphysical questions. In fact, the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas does address many metaphysical issues with his teachings of non-self and dependent arising.

The answers of the Buddha to the undetermined questions are due not only to pragmatic reasons but also to metaphysical reasons: the questions are inconsistent with the doctrines of non-self and dependent arising because they assume the existence of a permanent and independent self, a self that is either finite or infinite, identical or different from the body, existing or not existing after death. Besides pragmatic and metaphysical reasons, there are cognitive and affective reasons for the answers of the Buddha: the undetermined questions are based on ignorance about the nature of the five aggregates and craving for either immortal existence or inexistence. The questions are expressions of ‘identity views,’ that is, they are part of the problem of suffering. Answering the questions directly would have not done any good: a yes answer would have fostered more craving for immortal existence and led to eternalist views, and a no answer would have fostered further confusion and led to nihilist views (S.IV.400-1).

In the case of the undetermined questions about the liberated being, there are also apophatic reasons for answering “it does not apply.” The Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas illustrates the inapplicability of the questions with the simile of the fire extinct: just as it does not make sense to ask about the direction in which an extinct fire has gone, it is inappropriate to ask about the status of the liberated being beyond death: “The fire burned in dependence on its fuel of grass and sticks. When that is used up, if it does not get any more fuel, being without fuel, it is reckoned as extinguished. Similarly, the enlightened being has abandoned the five aggregates by which one might describe him…he is liberated from reckoning in terms of the five aggregates, he is profound, immeasurable, unfathomable like the ocean” (M.I.487-8).

b. Eternalism, Nihilism, and the Middle Way

There are three possible interpretations of the simile of the extinct fire: (1) liberated beings no longer exist beyond death (2) liberated beings exist in a mysterious unfathomable way beyond death (3) the Buddha is silent about both the liberated being and nirvana after death. The first interpretation seems the most logical conclusion given the Buddha’s ontology of suffering and the doctrine of non-self. However, the nihilist interpretation makes Buddhist practice meaningless and contradicts texts where the Buddha criticizes teachings not conducive to spiritual practice such as materialism and determinism (M.I.401ff). But more importantly, the nihilist interpretation is vehemently rejected in the Pāli Nikāyas: “As I am not, as I do not proclaim, so have I been baselessly, vainly, falsely, and wrongly misrepresented by some ascetics and brahmins thus: ‘the ascetic Gotama [Buddha] is one who leads astray; he teaches the annihilation, the destruction, the extermination of an existing being’ ”(M.I.140).

The second interpretation appears to some as following from the Buddha’s incontrovertible response to the nihilist reading of his teachings: since the Buddha rejects nihilism, he must somehow accept the eternal existence of liberated beings, or at least the eternal existence of nirvana. For eternalist interpreters, the texts in the Pāli Nikāyas that speak about the transcendence and ineffability of liberated beings and nirvana can be understood as implying their existence after or beyond death.

There are several eternalist readings of the Buddha’s thought. We have already mentioned the most common: the doctrine of non-self merely states that the five aggregates are not the true self, which is the transcendent and ineffable domain of nirvana. However, there are eternalist interpretations within Buddhism too. That is, interpretations that are nominally consistent with the doctrine of non-self but that nevertheless speak of something as eternally existing: either the mind of liberated beings or nirvana. For instance, Theravāda Buddhists usually see nirvana as non-self, but at the same time as an unconditioned (asaṃkhata) and deathless (amata) reality. The assumption, though rarely stated, is that liberated beings dwell eternally in nirvana without a sense of “I” and “mine,” which is a transcendent state beyond the comprehension of unenlightened beings. Another eternalist interpretation is that of the Dalai Lama who, following the standard interpretation of Tibetan Buddhists, claims that the Buddha did not teach the cessation of all aggregates but only of contaminated aggregates. That is, the uncontaminated aggregates of liberated beings continue to exist individually beyond death, though they are seen as impermanent, dependently arisen, non-self, and empty of inherent existence (Dalai Lama 1975:27). Similarly, Peter Harvey understands nirvana as a selfless and objectless state of consciousness different from the five aggregates that exists temporarily during life and eternally beyond death (1995: 186-7).

The problem with eternalist interpretations is that they contradict what the Pāli Nikāyas say explicitly about the way to consider liberated beings, the limits of language, the content of the Buddha’s teachings, and dependent arising as a middle way between the extremes of eternalism and annihilationism. In (S.III.110ff), Sāriputta, the Buddha’s leading disciple in doctrinal matters, explains that liberated beings should be considered neither as annihilated after death nor as existing without the five aggregates.

In (D.II.63-4) the Buddha makes clear that consciousness and mentality-materiality, that is, the five aggregates, are the limits of designation (adhivacana), language (nirutti), cognitions (viññatti), and understanding (paññā). Accordingly, in (D.II.68) the Buddha says it is inadequate to state that the liberated being exists after death, does not exist, both, or neither. This reading is confirmed by (Sn 1076): “There is not measure (pamāṇa) of one who has gone out, that by which [others] might speak (vajju) of him does not exist. When all things have been removed, then all ways of speech (vādapathā) are also removed.”

Given the Buddha’s understanding of the limits of language and understanding in the Pāli Nikāyas, it is not surprising that he responded to the accusation of teaching the annihilation of beings, by saying that “formerly and now I only teach suffering and the cessation of suffering.” Since the Buddha does not teach anything beyond the cessation of suffering at the moment of death, that is, beyond the limits of language and understanding, it is inaccurate to accuse him of teaching the annihilation of beings. Similarly, stating that liberated beings exist after death in a mysterious way beyond the four logical possibilities of existence, non-existence, both or neither, is explicitly rejected in (S.III.118-9) and (S.IV.384), where once again the Buddha concludes that he only makes known suffering and the cessation of suffering.

If the eternalist interpretation were correct, it would have been unnecessary for the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas to put so much emphasis on the teaching of dependent arising. Why would dependent arising be defined in (S.II.17) as right view and as the middle way between the extremes of eternalism and annihilationism if the truth were that the consciousness of liberated beings or the unconditioned nirvana exist eternally? If knowing and seeing dependent arising precludes someone from speculating about a permanent self in the past and the future (M.I.265), why would the Buddha teach anything about the eternal existence of liberated beings and nirvana?

In order to avoid the aforementioned contradictions entailed by eternalist readings of the Pāli Nikāyas, all texts about nirvana and the consciousness of liberated beings are to be understood as referring to this life or the moment of death, never to some mysterious consciousness or domain that exists beyond death. Since none of the texts about nirvana and liberated beings found in the Pāli Nikāyas refer unambiguously to their eternal existence beyond death, I interpret the Buddha as being absolutely silent about nirvana and liberated beings beyond death (Vélez de Cea 2004a). In other words, nothing of what the Pāli Nikāyas say goes beyond the limits of language and understanding, beyond the content of the Buddha’s teachings, and beyond dependent arising as the middle way between eternalism and annihilationism.

Instead of focusing on nirvana and liberated beings beyond death, the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas emphasizes dependent arising and the practice of the four foundations of mindfulness. Dependent arising is intended to avoid views about a permanent and independent self in the past and the future (M.I.265; M.III.196ff), and the four foundations of mindfulness are said to be taught precisely to destroy such views (D.III.141). That is, the Buddha’s fundamental concern is to address the problem of suffering in the present without being distracted by views about the past or the future: “Let not a person revive the past, or on the future build his hopes; for the past has been left behind and the future has not been reached. Instead with insight let him see each presently arising state (paccuppannañca yo dhammaṃ tattha tattha vipassati); let him know that and be sure of it, invincibly, unshakeably. Today the effort must be made, tomorrow death may come, who knows?” (Bhikkhu Bodhi’s translation. M.III.193).

5. Buddhist Ethics

Early Buddhist ethics includes more than lists of precepts and more than the section on ethical training of the eightfold noble path; that is, Buddhist ethics cannot be reduced to right action (abstaining from killing, stealing, lying), right speech (abstaining from false, divisive, harsh, and useless speech), and right livelihood (abstaining from professions that harm living beings). Besides bodily and verbal actions, the Pāli Nikāyas discuss a variety of mental actions including thoughts, motivations, emotions, and perspectives. In fact, it is the ethics of mental actions that constitutes the main concern of the Buddha’s teaching.

Early Buddhist ethics encompasses the entire spiritual path, that is, bodily, verbal, and mental actions. The factors of the eightfold noble path dealing with wisdom and concentration (right view, right intentions, rights effort, right concentration, right mindfulness) relate to different types of mental actions. The term “right” (sammā) in this context does not mean the opposite of “wrong,” but rather “perfect” or “complete;” that is, it denotes the best or the most effective actions to attain liberation. This, however, does not imply that the Buddha advocates the most perfect form of ethical conduct for all his disciples.

Early Buddhist ethics is gradualist in the sense that there are diverse ways of practicing the path with several degrees of commitment; not all disciples are expected to practice Buddhist ethics with the same intensity. Monks and nuns take more precepts and are supposed to devote more time to spiritual practices than householders. However, a complete monastic code (prātimoka) like those found in later Vinaya literature does not appear in the Pāli Nikāyas. The most comprehensive formulation of early Buddhist ethics, probably common to monastic disciples and lay people, is the list of ten dark or unwholesome actions and their opposite, the ten bright or wholesome actions: three bodily actions (abstaining from killing, stealing, sexual misconduct), four verbal actions (abstaining from false, divisive, harsh, and useless speech), and tree mental actions (abstaining from covetousness, ill-will, and dogmatic views).

The Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas defines action in terms of intention or choice (cetanā): “It is intention, monks, what I call action. Having intended, someone acts through body, speech, and mind” (A.III.415). The Pāli Nikāyas define the roots of unwholesome (akusala) actions as greed (lobha), aversion (dosa), and delusion (moha). Conversely, the roots of wholesome actions are defined as the opposite mental states (M.I.47). Some scholars infer from these two definitions that Buddhist ethics is an ethics of intention or an agent-based form of virtue ethics. That is, according to these scholars, for the Buddha of the the Pāli Nikāyas, only the agent’s intention or motivation determine the goodness of actions. This interpretation, however, is disproved by many texts of the Pāli Nikāyas where good and evil actions are discussed without any reference to the underlying intention or motivation of the agent. Consequently, the more comprehensive account understands intention not as the only factor that determines the goodness of actions, but rather as the condition of possibility, the necessary condition for speaking about action in the moral sense. Without intention or choice, there is no ethical action. Similarly, motivation, while a central moral factor in Buddhist ethics, is neither the only factor nor always the most important factor to determine the goodness of actions. Understanding Buddhist ethics as concerned exclusively with the three roots of the wholesome does not fully capture the breath of moral concern of the Pāli Nikāyas (Vélez de Cea 2004b).

The fundamental moral law of the universe according to early Buddhism is what is popularly called the “law of karma”: good actions produce good consequences, and bad actions lead to bad consequences. The consequences of volitional actions can be experienced in this life or in subsequent lives. Although not everything we experience is due to past actions, physical appearance, character, lifespan, prosperity, and rebirth destination are believed to be influenced by past actions. This influence however, is not to be confused with fatalism, a position rejected in the Pāli Nikāyas. There is always room for mitigating and even eradicating the negative consequences of past actions with new volitions in the present. That is, past karma does not dictate our situation: the existence of freewill and the possibility of changing our predicament is always assumed. There is conditioning of the will and other mental factors, but no hard determinism.

A common objection to early Buddhist ethics is how there can be freewill and responsibility without a permanent self that transmigrates through lives. If there is no self, who is the agent of actions? Who experiences the consequences of actions? Is the person who performs an action in this life the same person that experiences the consequences of that action in a future life? Is it a different person? The Buddha considers these questions improper of his disciples, who are trained to explain things in terms of causes and condition (S.II.61ff; S.II.13ff)). In other words, since the Buddha’s disciples explain processes with the doctrine of dependent arising, they should avoid explanations that use personal terms and presuppose the extremes of eternalism and nihilism. The moral agent is not a substance-self but rather the five aggregates, a dynamic and dependently-arisen process-self who, like a flame or the water of a river, changes all the time and yet has some degree of continuity.

The most common interpretations of early Buddhist ethics view its nature as either a form of agent-based virtue ethics or as a sophisticated kind of consequentialism. The concern for virtue cultivation is certainly prevalent in early Buddhism, and evidently the internal mental state or motivation underlying actions is extremely important to determine the overall goodness of actions, which is the most important factor for advanced practitioners. Similarly, the concern for the consequences of actions, whether or not they lead to the happiness or the suffering of oneself and others, also pervades the Pāli Nikāyas. However, the goodness of actions in the Pāli Nikāyas does not depend exclusively on either the goodness of motivations or the goodness of consequences. Respect to status and duty, observance of rules and precepts, as well as the intrinsic goodness of certain external bodily and verbal actions are equally necessary to assess the goodness of at least certain actions. Since the foundations of right action in the Pāli Nikāyas are irreducible to one overarching principle, value or criterion of goodness, early Buddhist ethics is pluralistic in a metaethical sense. Given the unique combination of deontological, consequentialist, and virtue ethical trends found in the Pāli Nikāyas, early Buddhist ethics should be understood in its own terms as a sui generis normative theory inassimilable to Western ethical traditions.

6. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

All references to the Pāli Nikāyas are to the edition of The Pāli Text Society, Oxford. References to the Aṅguttara, Dīgha, Majjhima, and Saṃyutta Nikāyas are to the volume and page number. References to Udāna and Itivuttaka are to the page number and to Dhammapada and Sutta Nipāta to the verse number.

A. Aṅguttara Nikāya

D. Dīgha Nikāya

M. Majjhima Nikāya

S. Saṃyutta Nikāya

Ud. Udāna

It. Itivuttaka

Dhp. Dhammapada

Sn. Sutta Nipāta

b. Secondary Sources

  • Bechert, H. (Ed) 1995. When Did the Buddha Live? The Controversy on the Dating of the Historical Buddha. Selected Papers Based on a Symposium Held under the Auspices of the Academy of Sciences in Göttingen. Delhi: Sri Satguru Publications. 1995.
  • Bhattacharya, K. 1973. L´Ātman-Brahman dans le Bouddhisme Ancien. París: EFEO.
  • Bhikkhu Ñānamoli and Bhikkhu Bodhi. 1995. The Middle Length Discourses of the Buddha. A New Translation of the Majjhima Nikāya. Kandy: Buddhist Publication Society.
  • Bhikkhu Ñāṇananda. 1971. Concept and Reality in Early Buddhist Thought. Kandy: Buddhist Publication Society.
  • Cousins, L.S. 1996. “Good or Skillful? Kusala in Canon and Commentary.” Journal of Buddhist Ethics.Vol. 3: 133-164.
  • Collins, S. 1982. Selfless Persons. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Collins, S. 1994. “What are Buddhists Doing When They Deny the Self?” In Religion and Practical Reason, edited by Frank E. Reynolds and David Tracy. Albany: SUNY.
  • Collins, S. 1998. Nirvana and other Buddhist Felicities. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press
  • Dalai Lama. 1994. The Way to Freedom. San Francisco: Harper.
  • Dharmasiri, G. 1996. Fundamentals of Buddhist Ethics. Singapore: Buddhist Research Society.
  • Fuller, P. 2005. The Notion of Diṭṭhi in Theravāda Buddhism. London: RoutledgeCurzon.
  • Gombrich, R. 1988. Theravāda Buddhism: A Social History from Ancient Benares to Modern Colombo. London: Routledge.
  • Gombrich, R. 1996. How Buddhism Began. London: Athlone.
  • Gethin, R. 2001. The Buddhist Path to Awakening. Richmon Surrey: Curzon Press.
  • Gowans, C. W. 2003. Philosophy of the Buddha. London: Routledge.
  • Hallisey, C. 1996. “Ethical Particularism in Theravāda Buddhism.” Journal of Buddhist Ethics. Vol. 3: 32-34.
  • Hamilton, S. 2000. Early Buddhism: A New Approach. Richmon Surrey: Curzon Press.
  • Harvey, P. 1995. The Selfless Mind: Personality, Consciousness, and Nirvana in Early Buddhism. Richmon Surrey: Curzon Press.
  • Harvey, P. 1995. “Criteria for Judging the Unwholesomeness of Actions in the Texts of Theravāda Buddhism.” Journal of Buddhist Ethics. Vol. 2: 140-151.
  • Harvey, P. 2000. An Introduction to Buddhist Ethics. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Hoffman, F. J. 1987. Rationality and Mind in Early Buddhism. New Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass.
  • Hwang, S. 2006. Metaphor and Literalism in Buddhism: The Doctrinal History of Nirvana. London: RoutledgeCurzon.
  • Jayatilleke, K. N. 1963. Early Buddhist Theory of Knowledge. London: Allen & Unwin.
  • Johansson, R. 1969. The Psychology of Nirvana. London: Allen and Unwin Ltd.
  • Kalupahana, D. 1976. Buddhist Philosophy: A Historical Analysis. Honolulu: University Press of Hawai’i.
  • Kalupahana, D. 1992. A History of Buddhist Philosophy: Continuities and Discontinuities. Honolulu: University Press of Hawai’i.
  • Keown, D. 1992. The Nature of Buddhist Ethics. New York: Palgrave.
  • Norman, K. R. 1983. Pāli Literature: Including the Canonical Literature in Prakrit and Sanskrit of all the Hīnayāna schools of Buddhism. Wiesbaden: Otto Harrassowitz.
  • Norman, K. R. 1990-6. Collected Papers. Oxford: The Pāli Text Society.
  • Pande, G.C. 1995. Studies in the Origins of Buddhism. New Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass.
  • Pérez-Remón, J. 1980. Self and Non-Self in Early Buddhism. New York: Mouton.
  • Perret, R. 1986. “Egoism, Altruism, and Intentionalism in Buddhist Ethics.” Journal of IndianPhilosophy. Vol. 15: 71-85.
  • Premasiri, P. D. 1987. “Early Buddhist Concept of Ethical Knowledge: A Philosophical Analysis.” Kalupahana, D.J. and Weeraratne, W.G. eds. Buddhist Philosophy and Culture: Essays in Honor of N.A. Jayawickrema. Colombo: N.A. Jayawickrema Felicitation Volume Committee. Pp. 37-70.
  • Ronkin, N. 2005. Early Buddhist Metaphysics: The Making of a Philosophical Tradition. London: RoutledgeCurzon.
  • Tilakaratne, A. 1993. Nirvana and Ineffability: A Study of the Buddhist Theory of Reality and Languague. Colombo: Karunaratne and Sons.
  • Vélez de Cea , A. 2004 a. “The Silence of the Buddha and the Questions about the Tathāgata after Death.” The Indian International Journal of Buddhist Studies, no 5.
  • Vélez de Cea , A. 2004 b. “The Early Buddhist Criteria of Goodness and the Nature of Buddhist Ethics.”Journal of Buddhist Ethics 11, pp.123-142.
  • Vélez de Cea , A. 2005. “Emptiness in the Pāli Suttas and the Question of Nāgārjuna’s Orthodoxy.”Philosophy East and West. Vol. 55: 4.
  • Webster, D. 2005. The Philosophy of Desire in the Pali Canon. London: RoutledgeCurzon.

See also the Encylopedia articles on Madhyamaka Buddhism and Pudgalavada Buddhism.

Author Information

Abraham Velez
Eastern Kentucky University
U. S. A.

Joseph Butler (1692—1752)

butlerBishop Joseph Butler is a well-known religious philosopher of the eighteenth century. He is still read and discussed among contemporary philosophers, especially for arguments against some major figures in the history of philosophy, such as Thomas Hobbes and John Locke. In his Fifteen Sermons Preached at the Rolls Chapel (1729), Butler argues against Hobbes's egoism, and in the Analogy of Religion (1736), he argues against Locke's memory-based theory of personal identity.

Overall, Butler's philosophy is largely defensive. His general strategy is to accept the received systems of morality and religion and, then, defend them against those who think that such systems can be refuted or disregarded. Butler ultimately attempts to naturalize morality and religion, though not in an overly reductive way, by showing that they are essential components of nature and common life. He argues that nature is a moral system to which humans are adapted via conscience. Thus, in denying morality, Butler takes his opponents to be denying our very nature, which is untenable. Given this conception of nature as a moral system and certain proofs of God's existence, Butler is then in a position to defend religion by addressing objections to it, such as the problem of evil.

This article provides an overview of Butler's life, works, and influence with special attention paid to his writings on religion and ethics. The totality of his work addresses the questions: Why be moral? Why be religious? Which morality? Which religion? In attempting to answer such questions, Butler develops a philosophy that possesses a unity often neglected by those who read him selectively. The philosophy that develops is one according to which religion and morality are grounded in the natural world order.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Human Nature as Made for Virtue
  3. Human Life as in the Presence of God
  4. This Life as a Prelude to a Future Life
  5. The World as a Moral Order
  6. The Christian Scriptures as a Revelation
  7. Public Institutions as Moral Agents
  8. Butler's Influence
  9. References and Further Reading
    1. Works by Butler
    2. Secondary Literature

1. Life

Joseph Butler was born into a Presbyterian family at Wantage. He attended a dissenting academy, but then converted to the Church of England intent on an ecclesiastical career. Butler expressed distaste for Oxford's intellectual conventions while a student at Oriel College; he preferred the newer styles of thought, especially those of John Locke, the 3rd Earl of Shaftesbury and Francis Hutcheson, leading David Hume to characterize Butler as one of those "who have begun to put the science of man on a new footing, and have engaged the attention, and excited the curiosity of the public." Butler benefited from the support of Samuel Clarke and the Talbot family.

In 1719, Butler was appointed to his first job, preacher to the Rolls Chapel in Chancery Lane, London. Butler's anonymous letters to Clarke had been published in 1716, but a selection of his Fifteen Sermons Preached at the Rolls Chapel (1729) was the first work published under his name. The Rolls sermons are still widely read and have held the attention of secular philosophers more than any other sermons in history. Butler moved north and became rector of Stanhope in 1725. Only at this point is his life documented in any detail, and his tenure is remembered mainly for the Analogy of Religion (1736). Soon after publication of that work, Butler became Bishop of Bristol. Queen Caroline had died urging his preferment, but Bristol was one of the poorest sees, and Butler expressed some displeasure in accepting it. Once Butler became dean of St. Paul's in 1740, he was able to use that income to support his work in Bristol. In 1750, not long before his death, Butler was elevated to Durham, one of the richest bishoprics. The tradition that Butler declined the See of Canterbury was conclusively discredited by Norman Sykes (1936), but continues to be repeated uncritically in many reference works. Butler's famous encounter with John Wesley has only recently been reconstructed in as full detail as seems possible given the state of the surviving evidence, and we are now left with little hope of ever knowing what their actual relationship was. They disagreed, certainly, on Wesley's right to preach without a license, and on this point Butler seems entirely in the right; but Butler may have supported Wesley more than he opposed him, and Wesley seems entirely sincere in his praise of the Analogy.

Butler has become an icon of a highly intellectualized, even rarefied, theology, "wafted in a cloud of metaphysics," as Horace Walpole said. Ironically, Butler refused as a matter of principle to write speculative works or to pursue curiosity. All his writings were directly related to the performance of his duties at the time or to career advancement. From the Rolls sermons on, all his works are devoted to pastoral philosophy.

A pastoral philosopher gives philosophically persuasive arguments for seeing life in a particular way when such a seeing-as may have a decisive effect on practice. Butler had little interest in, and only occasionally practiced, natural theology in the scholastic sense; his intent is rather defensive: to answer those who claim that morals and religion, as conventionally understood, may be safely disregarded. Butler tried to show, as a refutation of the practice of his day (as he perceived it), that morals and religion are natural extensions of the common way of life usually taken for granted, and thus that those who would dispense with them bear a burden of proof they are unable to discharge. In arguing that morals and religion are favored by a presumption already acknowledged in ordinary life, Butler employs many types of appeal, at least some of which would be fallacious if used in an attempted demonstrative argument.

2. Human Nature as Made for Virtue

Butler's argument for morality, found primarily in his sermons, is an attempt to show that morality is a matter of following human nature. To develop this argument, he introduces the notions of nature and of a system. There are, he says, various parts to human nature, and they are arranged hierarchically. The fact that human nature is hierarchically ordered is not what makes us manifestly adapted to virtue, rather, it is what Butler calls "conscience" that is at the top of this hierarchy. Butler does sometimes refer to the conscience as the voice of God; but, contrary to what is sometimes alleged, he never relies on divine authority in asserting the supremacy, the universality or the reliability of conscience. Butler clearly believes in the autonomy of the conscience as a secular organ of knowledge.

Whether the conscience judges principles, actions or persons is not clear, perhaps deliberately since such distinctions are of no practical significance. What Butler is concerned to show is that to dismiss morality is in effect to dismiss our own nature, and therefore absurd. As to which morality we are to follow, Butler seems to have in mind the common core of civilized standards. He stresses the degree of agreement and reliability of conscience without denying some differences remain. All that is required for his argument to go through is that the opponent accept in practice that conscience is the supreme authority in human nature and that we ought not to disregard our own nature.

The most significant recent challenge to Butler's moral theory is by Nicholas Sturgeon (1976), a reply to which appears in Stephen Darwall (1995).

Besides the appeal to the rank of conscience, Butler offered many other observations in his attempt to show that we are made for (that is, especially suited to) virtue. In a famous attack on the egoistic philosophy of Thomas Hobbes, he argues that benevolence is as much a part of human nature as self-love. Butler also argues that various other aspects of human nature are adapted to virtue, sometimes in surprising ways. For example, he argues that resentment is needed to balance benevolence. He also deals forthrightly with self-deception.

Only three of the fifteen sermons deal with explicitly religious themes: the sermons on the love of God and the sermon on ignorance.

3. Human Life as in the Presence of God

Butler's views on our knowledge of God are among the most frequently misstated aspects of his philosophy. Lewis White Beck's exposition (1937) of this neglected aspect of Butler's philosophy has itself been generally neglected, and both friends and foes frequently assert that Butler "assumed" that God exists. Butler never assumes the existence of God; rather, at least after his exchange with Clarke, he takes it as granted that God's existence can be and has been proved to the satisfaction of those who were party to the discussion in his time. The charge, frequently repeated since the mid-nineteenth century, that Butler's position is reversible once an opponent refuses to grant God's existence, is therefore groundless. It is true that Butler does not expound any proof of God's existence. (Notice that this fact makes it problematic to identify him with the character Cleanthes in Hume's Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion.) However, he does endorse many such proofs, using common names rather than citing specific texts.

The sermons on the love of God are rarely read today, but they provide abundant evidence that Butler's God is not some remote deity who created the world and then lost interest in it. On the contrary, the difference that God makes to us is the difference that a lively sense of God's presence makes.

4. This Life as a Prelude to a Future Life

Butler considered the expectation of a future life to be the foundation of all our hopes and fears. He does not state exactly why this is so, and most commentators have concluded that he is referring to hopes and fears regarding what will happen to us as individuals when we die. Such an intention would be contrary to Butler's general line of thought. More consonant with what Butler does say is the Platonic point that one cannot truly benefit by acting viciously and then escaping punishment. Since that is what appears to happen in this world, appearances must be denied. Secondly, and here Butler would agree with Hume, in this world there is an appearance that the superintendence of the universe is not entirely just. Thus, there are three logical options: (1) the universe is ultimately unjust, (2) contrary to appearances, this world is somehow just, or (3) the universe is just, but only when viewed more broadly than we are able to see now. Given these options, Butler thinks there are good practical reasons for accepting the third in practice.

The first chapter of the Analogy is devoted to the argument that what little we know of the nature of death is insufficient to warrant an assurance that death is the end of us. And when we lack sufficient warrant for acting on the presumption of a change, we must act on the presumption of continuance. The recurrent objection, offered by such otherwise sympathetic readers as Richard Swinburne, is that in the physical destruction of the body, we do have sufficient warrant. Roderick Chisholm (1986) has proposed a counter to this criticism.

Butler appends to his discussion of a future life a brief essay on personal identity, and this is the only part of the Analogy widely read today. That it is read independently is perhaps just as well since it is difficult to see how it is related to the general argument. Butler says he needs to answer objections to personal identity continuing after death, which he certainly must do. But the view he proposes to refute is Locke's, and Locke seemed not to see that his theory of personal identity presented a problem for expectation of a future life. Locke's theory was that memory is constitutive of personal identity. Even if Butler is right in his objection to Locke's theory, he certainly needs personal memories to be retained since they are presupposed by his theory of rewards and punishments after death.

5. The World as a Moral Order

Butler's work is directed mainly against skeptics (and those inclined toward skepticism) and as an aid for those who propose to argue with skeptics. The general motivation for his work is to overcome intellectual embarrassment at accepting the received systems of morals and religion. To succeed, Butler must present a case that is plausible if not fully probative, and he must do so without resorting to an overly reductive account of morals and religion. Butler's strategy is to naturalize morals and religion. Although generally scorning scholastic methods, Butler does accept the ontological argument for God's existence, the appeal to the unity and simplicity of the soul and the distinction of natural and revealed religion. The fundamental doctrine of natural religion is the efficacy of morals—that the categories of virtue and vice, already discussed in terms of human nature, have application to the larger world of nature. To some, fortune and misfortune in this world seem not to be correlated with any moral scheme. But, with numerous examples, Butler argues that the world as we ordinarily experience it does have the appearance of a moral order.

Butler takes up two objections: the possibility that the doctrine of necessity is true and the familiar problem of evil. With regard to necessity, he argues that, even if such is the case, we are in no position to live in accord with necessity since we cannot see our own or others' actions as entirely necessitated. Butler's approach to the problem of evil is to appeal to human ignorance, a principal theme in various aspects of his work. What Butler must show is that we do not know of the actual occurrence of any event such that it could not be part of a just world. Since he does appeal to our ignorance, Butler cannot be said to have produced a theodicy, a justification of the ways of God to us, but his strategy may show a greater intellectual integrity, and may be sufficient for his purposes.

6. The Christian Scriptures as a Revelation

Butler's treatment of revealed religion is less satisfactory, since he had only a partial understanding of modern biblical criticism. Butler does insist on treating the Bible like any other book for critical purposes. He maintains that if any biblical teaching appears immoral or contrary to what we know by our natural faculties, then that alone is sufficient reason for seeking another interpretation of the scripture. The point of a revelation is to supplement natural knowledge, not to overrule it. Far from compromising the role of religion, this view is entailed by the fact that nature, natural knowledge and revelation all have a common source in God.

It is only in the second part of his Analogy that Butler argues against the deists. The characterization of his work as on the whole a reply to the deists is entirely a modern invention and is not found anywhere in the first century of reactions.

Only one chapter of the Analogy is devoted to the "Christian evidences" of miracles and prophecy, and even there Butler confines himself to some judicious remarks on the logical character of the arguments, especially with regard to miracles. In general, Butler presents revelation as wholly consistent with, but also genuinely supplemental of, natural knowledge. Hume says he castrated his Treatise of Human Nature (1739/1740) out of regards for Butler. But based on the texts that survive, there is no reason to think Hume would have gotten the better of the argument. Charles Babbage (1837) eventually showed why Hume had no valid objection to Butler.

Unfortunately, Butler's account of scripture is entirely two-dimensional. He does not doubt the point that scripture was written in terms properly applicable to a previous state of society, but he has little sense of the canonical books themselves being redactions of a multitude of oral and literary traditions and sources.

7. Public Institutions as Moral Agents

In the six sermons preserved from the years he served as the Bishop of Bristol, Butler defends the moral nature of various philanthropic and political institutions of his day. And in his Charge to the Clergy at Durham, he presents a concise rationale for the Church.

8. Butler's Influence

Ernest Mossner (1936) is still the most useful survey of Butler's influence. Mossner claims that Butler was widely read in his own time, but his evidence may be insufficient to convince some. However that may be, there is no doubt that by the late eighteenth century Butler was widely read in Scottish universities, and from the early nineteenth century at Oxford, Cambridge and many American colleges, perhaps especially because the Scottish influence was so strong in America. Butler's work impressed David Hume and John Wesley, and Thomas Reid, Adam Smith and David Hartley considered themselves Butlerians. Butler was a great favorite of the Tractarians, but the association with them may have worked against his ultimate influence in England, especially since Newman attributed his own conversion to the Roman Church to his study of Butler. S. T. Coleridge was among the first to urge study of the sermons and to disparage the Analogy. The decline of interest in the Analogy in the late nineteenth century has never been satisfactorily explained, but Leslie Stephen's critical work was especially influential.

The editions most frequently cited today appeared only after wide interest in Butler's Analogy had evaporated. The total editions are sometimes said to be countless, but this is true only in the sense that there are no agreed criteria for individuating editions. The numerous ancillary essays and study guides are still useful as evidence of how Butler was studied and understood. At its height, Butler's influence cut across protestant denominational lines and party differences in the Church of England, but serious interest in the Analogy is now concentrated among certain Anglican writers.

9. References and Further Reading

Butler's first biography appeared in the supplement to the Biographia Britannica (London, 1766). The most frequently reprinted biography is by Andrew Kippis and appeared in his second edition of the Biographia Britannica (London, 1778-93). This second edition is often confused with the supplement to the first edition. The only full biography is Bartlett (1839).

The best modern edition of Butler's works is J.H. Bernard's, but it is a modernized text, as of 1900, and contains errors. Serious readers may consult the original editions, now available on microfilm.

a. Works by Butler

  • Several Letters to the Reverend Dr. Clarke. London: Knapton, 1716.
  • Fifteen Sermons Preached at the Rolls Chapel. London: second edition, 1729; six sermons added in the 1749 edition.
  • Analogy of Religion, Natural and Revealed, to the Constitution and Nature. London: Knapton, 1736.
  • Charge Delivered to the Clergy. Durham: Lane, 1751.

b. Secondary Literature

  • Babbage, Charles. Ninth Bridgewater Treatise. London: J. Murray, 1837.
  • Babolin, Albino. Joseph Butler. Padova: LaGarangola, 1973. 2 vols.
  • Baker, Frank. "John Wesley and Bishop Joseph Butler: A Fragment of Wesley's Manuscript Journal 16th to 24th August 1739." Proceedings of the Wesley Historical Society. 42 (May 1980) 93-100.
  • Bartlett, Thomas. Memoirs of the Life, Character and Writings of Joseph Butler. London: John W. Parker, 1839.
  • Beck, Lewis White. "A Neglected Aspect of Butler's Ethics." Sophia 5 (1937) 11-15.
  • Butler, J.F. "John Wesley's Defense Before Bishop Butler." Proceedings of the Wesley Historical Society. 20 (1935) 63-67.
  • Butler, J.F. "John Wesley's Defense Before Bishop Butler: A Further Note." Proceedings of the Wesley Historical Society. 20 (1936) 193-194.
  • Chisholm, Roderick. "Self-Profile" in Roderick M. Chisholm, ed. Radu J. Bogdan. Dordrecht:Reidel, 1986.
  • Cunliffe, Christopher, ed. Joseph Butler's Moral and Religious Thought: Tercentenary Essays. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1992.
  • Darwall, Stephen. The British Moralists and the Internal 'Ought' 1640-1740. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1995.
  • Mossner, E.C. Bishop Butler and the Age of Reason. New York: Macmillan, 1936.
  • Penelhum, Terence. Butler. London: Routledge & Kegan Paul, 1985.
  • Stephen, Leslie. "Butler, Joseph." Dictionary of National Biography, 1886.
  • Sturgeon, Nicholas L. "Nature and Conscience in Butler's Ethics." Philosophical Review 85 (1976) 316-356.
  • Sykes, Norman. "Bishop Butler and the Primacy" Theology (1936) 132- 137.
  • Sykes, Norman. "Bishop Butler and the Primacy" (letter) Theology (1958) 23.

Author Information

David E. White
St. John Fisher College
U. S. A.

Anaximenes (d. 528 B.C.E.)

AnaximenesAccording to the surviving sources on his life, Anaximenes flourished in the mid 6th century B.C.E. and died about 528. He is the third philosopher of the Milesian School of philosophy, so named because like Thales and Anaximander, Anaximenes was an inhabitant of Miletus, in Ionia (ancient Greece). Theophrastus notes that Anaximenes was an associate, and possibly a student, of Anaximander's.

Anaximenes is best known for his doctrine that air is the source of all things. In this way, he differed with his predecessors like Thales, who held that water is the source of all things, and Anaximander, who thought that all things came from an unspecified boundless stuff.

Table of Contents

  1. Doctrine of Air
  2. Doctrine of Change
  3. Origin of the Cosmos
  4. Influence on Later Philosophy
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Doctrine of Air

Anaximenes seems to have held that at one time everything was air. Air can be thought of as a kind of neutral stuff that is found everywhere, and is available to participate in physical processes. Natural forces constantly act on the air and transform it into other materials, which came together to form the organized world. In early Greek literature, air is associated with the soul (the breath of life) and Anaximenes may have thought of air as capable of directing its own development, as the soul controls the body (DK13B2 in the Diels-Kranz collection of Presocratic sources). Accordingly, he ascribed to air divine attributes.

2. Doctrine of Change

Given his doctrine that all things are composed of air, Anaximenes suggested an interesting qualitative account of natural change:

[Air] differs in essence in accordance with its rarity or density. When it is thinned it becomes fire, while when it is condensed it becomes wind, then cloud, when still more condensed it becomes water, then earth, then stones. Everything else comes from these. (DK13A5)

Using two contrary processes of rarefaction and condensation, Anaximenes explains how air is part of a series of changes. Fire turns to air, air to wind, wind to cloud, cloud to water, water to earth and earth to stone. Matter can travel this path by being condensed, or the reverse path from stones to fire by being successively more rarefied. Anaximenes provides a crude kind of empirical support by appealing to a simple experiment: if one blows on one's hand with the mouth relaxed, the air is hot; if one blows with pursed lips, the air is cold (DK13B1). Hence, according to Anaximenes we see that rarity is correlated with heat (as in fire), and density with coldness, (as in the denser stuffs).

Anaximenes was the first recorded thinker who provided a theory of change and supported it with observation. Anaximander had described a sequence of changes that a portion of the boundless underwent to form the different stuffs of the world, but he gave no scientific reason for changes, nor did he describe any mechanism by which they might come about. By contrast, Anaximenes uses a process familiar from everyday experience to account for material change. He also seems to have referred to the process of felting, by which wool is compressed to make felt. This industrial process provides a model of how one stuff can take on new properties when it is compacted.

3. Origin of the Cosmos

Anaximenes, like Anaximander, gives an account of how our world came to be out of previously existing matter. According to Anaximenes, earth was formed from air by a felting process. It began as a flat disk. From evaporations from the earth, fiery bodies arose which came to be the heavenly bodies. The earth floats on a cushion of air. The heavenly bodies, or at least the sun and the moon, seem also to be flat bodies that float on streams of air. On one account, the heavens are like a felt cap that turns around the head. The stars may be fixed to this surface like nails. In another account, the stars are like fiery leaves floating on air (DK13A14). The sun does not travel under the earth but circles around it, and is hidden by the higher parts of the earth at night.

Like Anaximander, Anaximenes uses his principles to account for various natural phenomena. Lightning and thunder result from wind breaking out of clouds; rainbows are the result of the rays of the sun falling on clouds; earthquakes are caused by the cracking of the earth when it dries out after being moistened by rains. He gives an essentially correct account of hail as frozen rainwater.

Most commentators, following Aristotle, understand Anaximenes’ theory of change as presupposing material monism. According to this theory, there is only one substance, (in this case air) from which all existing things are composed. The several stuffs: wind, cloud, water, etc., are only modifications of the real substance that is always and everywhere present. There is no independent evidence to support this interpretation, which seems to require Aristotle’s metaphysical concepts of form and matter, substratum and accident that are too advanced for this period. Anaximenes may have supposed that the ‘stuffs’ simply change into one another in order.

4. Influence on Later Philosophy

Anaximenes’ theory of successive change of matter by rarefaction and condensation was influential in later theories. It is developed by Heraclitus (DK22B31), and criticized by Parmenides (DK28B8.23-24, 47-48). Anaximenes’ general theory of how the materials of the world arise is adopted by Anaxagoras(DK59B16), even though the latter has a very different theory of matter. Both Melissus (DK30B8.3) and Plato (Timaeus 49b-c) see Anaximenes’ theory as providing a common-sense explanation of change. Diogenes of Apollonia makes air the basis of his explicitly monistic theory. The Hippocratic treatise On Breaths uses air as the central concept in a theory of diseases. By providing cosmological accounts with a theory of change, Anaximenes separated them from the realm of mere speculation and made them, at least in conception, scientific theories capable of testing.

5. References and Further Reading

There are no monographs on Anaximenes in English. Articles on him are sometimes rather specialized in nature. A number of chapters in books on the Presocratics are helpful.

  • Barnes, Jonathan. The Presocratic Philosophers. London: Routledge & Kegan Paul (1 vol. edn.), 1982. Ch. 3.
    • Gives a philosophically rich defense of the standard interpretation of Anaximenes.
  • Bicknell, P. J. "Anaximenes' Astronomy." Acta Classica 12: 53-85.
    • An interesting reconstruction of the conflicting reports on Anaximenes' astronomy.
  • Classen, C. Joachim. "Anaximander and Anaximenes: The Earliest Greek Theories of Change?" Phronesis 22: 89-102.
    • This article provides a good assessment of one of Anaximenes' major contributions.
  • Guthrie, W. K. C. A History of Greek Philosophy. Vol. 1. Cambridge: Cambridge U. Pr., 1962. 115-40.
    • A good introduction to Anaximenes' thought.
  • Kirk, G. S., J. E. Raven and M. Schofield. The Presocratic Philosophers. 2nd edn. Cambridge: Cambridge UP, 1983. Ch. 4.
    • A careful analysis of the texts of Anaximenes.
  • Wöhrle, Georg. Anaximenes aus Milet. Stuttgart: Franz Steiner Verlag, 1993.
    • This brief edition adds four new testimonies to the evidence about Anaximenes and challenges the standard interpretation. It is useful as a counterbalance to the received view, though I think particular criticisms it makes of that view are wrong.

Author Information

Daniel W. Graham
Brigham Young University
U. S. A.

Vladimir Solovyov (1853—1900)

SolovyovSolovyov was a 19th Century Russian Philosopher. He is considered a prolific but complicated character. His output aimed to be a comprehensive philosophical system, yet he produced what is considered contentious, theosophical and fundamentally inconclusive results.

This article examines in detail Slovyov’s five main works. It also looks into the controversy he generated and his possible philosophical legacy. In the course of five main works – three were completed, two were left unfinished – Solovyov demonstrated a predilection for grand topics of study and an ambitious aim to produce a comprehensive philosophical system that rejected accepted notions of contemporary European Philosophy. In his first major work, The Crisis of Western Philosophy (written when he was twenty-one), he argues against positivism and for moving away from a dichotomy of “speculative” (rationalist) and “empirical” knowledge in favour of a post-philosophical enquiry that would reconcile all notions of thought in a new transcendental whole.

He carried on his attempted synthesis of rationalism, empiricism and mysticism in Philosophical Principles of Integral Knowledge, and he turned to a study of ethics leading to a solidifying of his epistemology in Critique of Abstract Principles.

In the later period of his life, he recast his ethics in The Justification of the Good and his epistemology in Theoretical Philosophy.

Due to his conclusions repeatedly resting on a call upon an aspect of the divine or the discovery of an “all-encompassing spirit,” the soundness of his arguments have often been called into question. For the same reason, and compounded by a tendency to express himself in theological and romantically nationalist language, he is also often dismissed as a mystic or fanatic. Although, as the article below argues, if read as a product of his time, they are more sensible and less polemical.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Interpretations of Solovyov's Philosophical Writings.
  3. The Crisis of Western Philosophy
  4. Philosophical Principles of Integral Knowledge
  5. Critique of Abstract Principles
  6. The Justification of the Good
  7. Theoretical Philosophy
  8. Concluding Remarks
  9. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Life

Solovyov was born in Moscow in 1853. His father, Sergej Mikhailovich, a professor at Moscow University, is universally recognized as one of Russia's greatest historians. After attending secondary school in Moscow, Vladimir enrolled at the university and began his studies there in the natural sciences in 1869, his particular interest at this time being biology. Already at the age of 13 he had renounced his Orthodox faith to his friends, accepting the banner of materialism perhaps best illustrated by the fictional character of Bazarov in Turgenev's novel Fathers and Sons and the actual historical figure of Pisarev. During the first two or three years of study at the university Solovyov grew disenchanted with his ardent positivism and did poorly in his examinations. An excellent student prior to this time, there is no reason for us to doubt his intellectual gifts. Nevertheless, although he himself as well as his interpreters have attributed his poor performance to growing disinterest in his course of study, this reasoning may sound to us at least somewhat disingenuous. In any case, Solovyov subsequently enrolled as an auditor in the Historical-Philosophical Faculty, then passing the examination for a degree in June 1873.

At some point during 1872 Solovyov reconverted, so to speak, to Orthodoxy. During the academic year 1873-74 he attended lectures at the Moscow Ecclesiastic Academy--an unusual step for a lay person. At this time Solovyov also began the writing of his magister's dissertation, several chapters of which were published in a Russian theological journal in advance of’ his formal defense of it in early December 1874.

The death of his Moscow University philosophy teacher Pamfil Jurkevich created a vacancy that Solovyov surely harbored hopes of eventually filling. Nevertheless, despite being passed over, owing, at least in part, to his young age and lack of credentials, he was named a docent (lecturer) in philosophy. In spite of taking up his teaching duties with enthusiasm, within a few months Solovyov applied for a scholarship to do research abroad, primarily in London's British Museum.

His stay in the English capital was met with mixed emotions, but it could not have been entirely unpleasant, for in mid-September 1875 he was still informing his mother of plans to return to Russia only the following summer. For whatever reason, though, Solovyov abruptly changed his mind, writing again to his mother a mere month later that his work required him to go to Egypt via Italy and Greece. Some have attributed his change of plans to a mystical experience while sitting in the reading room of the Museum!

Upon his return to Russia the following year, Solovyov taught philosophy at Moscow University. He began work on a text that we know as the Philosophical Principles of Integral Knowledge, but which he never finished. In early 1877 Solovyov relinquished his university position due to his aversion towards academic politics, took up residence in St. Petersburg and accepted employment in the Ministry of Public Education. While preparing his doctoral dissertation, Solovyov gave a series of highly successful popular lectures at St. Petersburg University that was later published as Lectures on Divine Humanity, and in 1880 he defended a doctoral dissertation at St. Petersburg University. Any lingering hope Solovyov may have entertained of obtaining a professorship in Russia were dashed when in early 1881 during a public lecture he appealed to the Tsar to pardon the regicides of the latter's father Alexander II.

For the remainder of the 1880s, despite his prolificacy, Solovyov concerned himself with themes of little interest to contemporary Western philosophy. He returned, however, to traditional philosophical issues in the 1890s, working in particular on ethics and epistemology. His studies on the latter, however, were left quite incomplete owing to his premature death in 1900 at the age of 47. At the end Solovyov, together with his younger brother, was also preparing a new Russian translation of Plato's works.

2. Interpretations of Solovyov's Philosophical Writings

Despite the vast amount of secondary literature, particularly, of course, in Russian, little, especially that in English, is of interest to the professionally-trained philosopher. Nevertheless, even while memory of him was still fresh, many of his friends differed sharply on key issues involved in interpreting Solovyov's writings and legacy.

Among the topics debated over the years has been the number of phases or periods through which his thought passed. Opinions have ranged from four to just one, depending largely on the different criteria selected for demarcating one period from another. Those who hold that Solovyov's thought underwent no "fundamental change" [Shein] do not deny that there were modifications but simply maintain that the fundamental thrust of his philosophy remained unaltered over the course of time. Others see different emphases in Solovyov's work from decade to decade. Yet in one of the most philosophically-informed interpretations, Solovyov moved from a philosophy of "integral knowledge" to a later phenomenological phase that anticipated the "essential methodology" of the German movement [Dahm].

Historically, another central concern among interpreters has been the extent of Solovyov's indebtedness to various other figures. Whereas several have stressed the influence of, if not an outright borrowing from, the late Schelling [Mueller, Shein], at least one prominent scholar has sought to accentuate Solovyov's independence and creativity [Losev]. Still others have argued for Solovyov's indebtedness to Hegel [Navickas], Kant [Vvedenskij], Boehme [David], the Russian Slavophiles and the philosophically-minded theologians Jurkevich and Kudryavtsev.

In Russia itself the thesis that Solovyov had no epistemology [Radlov] evoked a spirited rebuttal [Ern] that has continued in North America [Shein, Navickas]. None of these scholars, however, has demonstrated the presence of more than a rudimentary epistemology, at least as that term is currently employed in contemporary philosophy.

Additionally, the vast majority of secondary studies have dealt with Solovyov's mysticism and views on religion, nationalism, social issues, and the role of Russia in world history. Consequently, it is not surprising that those not directly acquainted with his explicit philosophical writings and their Russian context view Solovyov as having nothing of interest to say in philosophy proper. We should also mention one of the historically most influential views, one that initially at least appears quite plausible. Berdyaev, seeing Solovyov as a paradoxical figure, distinguished a day -- from a night-Solovyov. The "day-Solovyov" was a philosophical rationalist, in the broad sense, an idealist, who sought to convey his highly metaphysical religious and ontological conceptions through philosophical discourse utilizing terms current at the time; the "night -- Solovyov" was a mystic who conveyed his personal revelations largely through poetry.

3. The Crisis of Western Philosophy

This, Solovyov's first major work, displays youthful enthusiasm, vision, optimism and a large measure of audacity. Unfortunately, it is also at times repetitious and replete with sweeping generalizations, unsubstantiated conclusions, and non sequiturs. The bulk of the work is an excursion in the history of modern philosophy that attempts to substantiate and amplify Solovyov's justly famous claims, made in the opening lines, that: (i) philosophy -- qua a body of abstract, purely theoretical knowledge -- has finished its development; (ii) philosophy in this sense is no longer nor will it ever again be maintained by anyone; (iii) philosophy has bequeathed to its successor certain accomplishments or results that this successor will utilize to resolve the problems that philosophy has unsuccessfully attempted to resolve.

Solovyov tells us that his ambitious program differs from positivism in that, unlike the latter, he understands the superseded artifact called "philosophy" to include not merely its "speculative" but also its "empirical" direction. Whether these two directions constitute the entirety of modern philosophy, i.e., whether there has been any historical manifestation of another sense of philosophy, one that is not purely theoretical, during the modern era, is unclear. Also left unclear is what precisely Solovyov means by "positivism." He mentions as representatives of that doctrine Mill, Spencer and Comte, whose views were by no means identical, and mentions as the fundamental tenet of positivism that "independent reality cannot be given in external experience." This I take to mean that experience yields knowledge merely of things as they appear, not as they are "in themselves." Solovyov has, it would seem, confused positivism with phenomenalism.

Solovyov's reading of the development of modern philosophy proceeds along the lines of Hegel's own interpretation. He sees Hegel's "panlogism" as the necessary result of Western philosophy. The "necessity" here is clearly conceptual, although Solovyov implicitly accepts without further ado that this necessity has, as a matter of fact, been historically manifested in the form of individual philosophies. Moreover, in line with Hegel's apparent self-interpretation Solovyov agrees that the former's system permits no further development. For the latter, at least, this is because, having rejected the law of (non)contradiction, Hegel's philosophy sees internal contradiction, which otherwise would lead to further development, as a "logical necessity," i.e., as something the philosophy itself requires and is accommodated within the system itself.

Similarly, Solovyov's analysis of the movement from Hegelianism to mid-19th century German materialism is largely indebted to the left-Hegelians. Solovyov, however, merely claims that one can exit Hegelianism by acknowledging its fundamental one-sidedness. Yet in the next breath, as it were, he holds that the emergence of empiricism, qua materialism, was necessary. Out of the phenomenalism of empiricism arises Schopenhauer's philosophy and thence Eduard von Hartmann's.

All representatives of Western philosophy, including to some extent Schopenhauer and von Hartmann, see rational knowledge as the decomposition of intuition into its sensuous and logical elements. Such knowledge, however, in breaking up the concrete into abstractions without re-synthesizing them, additionally is unable to recognize these abstractions as such but must hypostatize them, that is, assign real existence to them.. Nevertheless, even were we to grant Solovyov's audacious thesis that all Western philosophers have done this abstraction and hypostatizing, it by no means follows that rational thought necessarily has had to follow this procedure.

According to Solovyov, von Hartmann, in particular, is aware of the one-sidedness of both rationalism and empiricism, which respectively single out the logical and the sense element in cognition to the exclusion of the other. Nevertheless, he too hypostatizes will and idea instead of realizing that the only way to avoid any and all bifurcations is through a recognition of what Solovyov terms "the fundamental metaphysical principle," namely that the all- encompassing spirit is the truly existent. This hastily enunciated conclusion receives here no further argument. Nor does Solovyov dwell on establishing his ultimate claim that the results of Western philosophical development, issuing in the discovery of the all-encompassing spirit, agree with the religious beliefs of the Eastern Church fathers.

4. Philosophical Principles of Integral Knowledge

This work originally appeared during 1877 as a series of articles in an official journal published by the Ministry of Education (Zhurnal Ministerstva narodnogo prosveshchenija). Of Solovyov's major writings it is probably the most difficult for the philosopher today to understand owing, to a large degree, to its forced trichotomization of philosophical issues and options and its extensive use of terms drawn from mystical sources even when employed in a quite different sense.

There are three fundamental aspects, or "subjective foundations," of human life--in Solovyov's terminology, "forms of being." They are: feeling, thinking and willing. Each of these has both a personal and a social side, and each has its objective intentional object. These are, respectively, objective beauty, objective truth and the objective good. Three fundamental forms of the social union arise from human striving for the good: economic society, political society (government), and spiritual society. Likewise in the pursuit of truth there arises positive science, abstract philosophy, and theology. Lastly, in the sphere of feeling we have the technical arts, such as architecture, the fine arts and a form of mysticism, which Solovyov emphasizes is an immediate spiritual connection with the transcendent world and as such is not to be confused with the term "mysticism" as used to indicate a reflection on that connection.

Human cultural evolution has literally passed through these forms and done so according to what Solovyov calls "an incontestable law of development." Economic socialism, positivism and utilitarian realism represent for him the highest point yet of Western civilization and, in line with his earlier work, the final stage of its development. But Western civilization with its social, economic, philosophic and scientific atomization represents only a second, transitional phase in human development. The next, final stage, characterized by freedom from all one- sidedness and elevation over special interests is presently a "tribal character" of the Slavic peoples and, in particular, of the Russian nation.

Although undoubtedly of some historical interest as an expression of and contribution to ideas circulating in Russia as to the country's role in world affairs, Solovyov expounded all the above without argument and as such is of little interest to contemporary philosophy. Of somewhat greater value is his critique of traditional philosophical directions.

Developing its essential principle to the end, empiricism holds that I know only what the senses tell me. Consequently, I know even of myself only through conscious impressions, which, in turn, means that I am nothing but states of consciousness. Yet my consciousness presupposes me. Thus, we have found that empiricism leads, by reductio ad absurdum, to its self-refutation. The means to avoid such a conclusion, however, lies in recognizing the absolute being of the cognizing subject, which, in short, is idealism.

Likewise, the consistent development of the idealist principle leads to a denial of the epistemic subject and pure thought. The dissolution of these two directions means the collapse of all abstract philosophy. We are left with two choices: either complete skepticism or the view that what truly exists has an independent reality quite apart from our material world, a view Solovyov terms "mysticism." With mysticism we have, in Solovyov's view, exhausted all logical options. That is, having seen that holding the truly existing to be either the cognized object or the cognizing subject leads to absurdity, the sole remaining logical possibility is that offered by mysticism, which, thus, completes the "circle of possible philosophical views." Although empiricism and rationalism (= idealism) rest on false principles, their respective objective contents, external experience, qua the foundation of natural science, and logical thought, qua the foundation of pure philosophy, are to be synthesized or encompassed along with mystical knowledge in "integral knowledge," what Solovyov terms "theosophy."

For whatever reason, Philosophical Principles of Integral Knowledge remained incomplete. Despite its expression of his own views, which undoubtedly at this stage were greatly indebted to the Slavophiles, Solovyov altered his original plan to submit this work as a doctoral dissertation. Instead, in April 1880 he defended at St. Petersburg University a large work that he had begun at approximately the same time as the Philosophical Principles and which, like the latter, appeared in serialized form starting in 1877 and as a separate book in 1880.

5. Critique of Abstract Principles

Originally planned to comprise three parts, ethics, epistemology and aesthetics, (which alone already reveals a debt to Kant) the completed work never turned to the last of these, on which, however, Solovyov labored extensively. Nevertheless, owing largely to its traditional philosophical style and its extended treatment of major historical figures, the Critique remains the most accessible of Solovyov's major early writings today.

(1) Subjective Ethics. Over the course of human development a number of principles have been advanced in pursuit of various goals deemed to be that for which human actions should strive—goals such as pleasure, happiness, fulfilment of duties, adherence to God's will, etc. Certainly seeking happiness, pleasure, or the fulfilment of duty is not unequivocally wrong. Yet the pursuit of any one of these alone without the others cannot provide a basis for a totally satisfactory ethical system. A higher synthesis or, if you will, a more encompassing unity is needed, one that will reveal how and when any of these particular pursuits is ethically warranted. Such a unity will show the truth, and thereby the error, of singling out any particular moment of the unity as sufficient alone. Doing so, that is, showing the proper place of each principle, showing them as necessary yet inadequate stages on the way to a complete synthetic system is what Solovyov means by "the critical method."

In the end all moral theories that rest on an empirical basis, something factual in human nature, fail because they cannot provide and account for obligation. The essential feature of moral law, as Solovyov understands the concept, is its absolute necessity for all rational beings. The Kantian influence here is unmistakable and indubitable. Nevertheless, Solovyov parts company with Kant in expressing that a natural inclination in support of an obligatory action enhances the moral value of an action. Since duty is the general form of the moral principle, whereas an inclination serves as the psychological motive for a moral action, i.e., as the material aspect of morality, the two cannot contradict one another.

The Kantian categorical imperative, which Solovyov, in general, endorses, presupposes freedom. Of course, we all feel that our actions are free, but what kind of freedom is this? Here Solovyov approaches phenomenology in stating that the job of philosophy is to analyze this feeling with an eye to determining what it is we are aware of. Undoubtedly, for the most part we can do as we please, but such freedom is freedom of action. The question, however, is whether I can actually want something other than I do, i.e., whether the will is free.

Again like Kant, Solovyov believes all our actions, even the will itself, is, at least viewed empirically, subject to the law of causality. From the moral perspective, however, there is a "causality of freedom," a freedom to initiate a causal sequence on the part of practical reason. In other words, empirically the will is determined, whereas transcendentally it is free. Solovyov, though, goes on to pose, at least rhetorically, the question whether this transcendental freedom is genuine or could it be that the will is subject to transcendental conditions. In doing so, he reveals that his conception of "transcendental" differs from that of Kant. Nevertheless, waving aside all difficulties associated with a resolution of the metaphysical issue of freedom of the will, Solovyov tells us, ethics has no need of such investigations; reason and empirical inquiry are sufficient. The criteria of moral activity lie in its universality and necessity, i.e., that the principle of one's action can be made a universal law.

(2) Objective Ethics. In order that the good determine my will I must be subjectively convinced that the consequent action can be realized. This moral action presupposes a certain knowledge of and is conditioned by society. Subjective ethics instructs us that we should treat others not as means but as ends. Likewise, they should treat me as an end. Solovyov terms a community of beings freely striving to realize each other's good as if it were his or her own good "free communality." Although some undoubtedly see material wealth as a goal, it cannot serve as a moral goal. Rather, the goal of free communality is the just distribution of wealth, which, in turn, requires an organization to administer fair and equal treatment of and to all, in other words, a political arrangement or government. To make the other person's good my good, I must recognize such concern as obligatory. That is, I must recognize the other as having rights, which my material interests cannot infringe.

If all individuals acted for the benefit of all, there would be no need for a coordination of interests, for interests would not be in conflict. There is, however, no universal consensus on benefits and often enough individually perceived benefits conflict. In this need for adjudication lies a source of government and law. Laws express the negative side of morality, i.e., they do not say what should be done, but what is not permitted. Thus, the legal order is unable to provide positive directives, precisely because what humans specifically should do and concretely aspire to attain remains conditional and contingent. The absolute, unconditional form of morality demands an absolute, unconditional content, namely, an absolute goal.

As a finite being, the human individual cannot attain the absolute except through positive interaction with all others. Whereas in the legal order each individual is limited by the other, in the aspiration or striving for the absolute the other aids or completes the self. Such a union of beings is grounded psychologically in love. As a contingent being the human individual cannot fully realize an absolute object or goal. Only in the process of individuals working in concert, forming a "total-unity," does love become a non-contingent state. Only in an inner unity with all does man realize what Solovyov calls "the divine principle."

Solovyov himself views his position as diametrically opposed to that of Kant, who from absolute moral obligation was led to postulating the existence of God, immortality and human freedom. For Solovyov, the realization of morality presupposes an affirmative metaphysics. Once we progress from Kant's purely subjective ethics to an objective understanding of ethics, we see the need for a conviction in the theoretical validity of Kant's three postulates, their metaphysical truth independent of their practical desirability.

Again differing from Kant, and Fichte too, Solovyov at this point in his life rejects the priority of ethics over metaphysics. The genuine force of the moral principle rests on the existence of the absolute order. And the necessary conviction in this order can be had only if we know it to be true, which demands an epistemological inquiry.

(3) Epistemology/Metaphysics. "To know what we should do we must know what is," Solovyov tells us. To say "what is," however, is informative only in contrast to saying, at least implicitly, "what is not" -- this we already know from the opening pages of Hegel's Logic. One answer is that the true is that which objectively exists independent of any knowing subject. Here Solovyov leads us down a path strikingly similar, at least in outline, to that taken in the initial chapters of Hegel's Phenomenology. If the objectively real is the true, then sense certainty is our guarantee of having obtained it. But this certainty cannot be that of an individual knowing subject alone, for truth is objective and thus the same for everyone. Truth must not be in the facts but the things that make up the facts. Moreover, truth cannot be the individual things in isolation, for truths would then be isomorphic with the number of things. Such a conception of truth is vacuous; no, truth is one. With this Solovyov believes he has passed to naturalism.

Of course, our immediate sense experience lacks universality and does not in all its facets correspond to objective reality. Clearly, many qualities of objects, for example, color and taste, are subjective. Thus, reality must be what is general or present in all sense experience. To the general foundation of sensation corresponds the general foundation of things, namely, that conveyed through the sense of touch, i.e., the experience of resistance. The general foundation of objective being is its impenetrability.

Holding true being to be single and impenetrable, however, remains untenable. Through a series of dialectical maneuvers, reminiscent of Hegel, Solovyov arrives at the position that true being contains multiplicity. That is, whereas it is singular owing to absolute impenetrability, it consists of separate particles, each of which is impenetrable. Having in this way passed to atomism, Solovyov provides a depiction largely indebted to Kant's Metaphysical Foundations of Natural Science. Solovyov recognizes that we have reached atomism, not through some experimental technique but through philosophical, logical reasoning. But every scientific explanation of the ultimate constituents of reality transgresses the bounds of experience. We return to the viewpoint that reality belongs to appearances alone, i.e., what is given in experience. Now, however, our realism has been dialectically transformed into a phenomenal or critical realism.

According to phenomenal realism, absolute reality is ultimately inaccessible to cognition. Nevertheless, that which cognitively is accessible constitutes a relative objectivity and is our sole standard for determining truth and thus knowledge. In this sensualism -- for that is what it is -- we refer particular sensations to definite objects. These objects are taken as objectively real despite the manifest subjectivity of sensation in general. Thus, objectification, as the imparting of the sense of objectivity onto the content of sensations, must be an independent activity of the cognizing subject.

Objectification, alone, cannot account for the definite object before me to which all my sensations of that object refer as parts or aspects. In addition to objectification there must be a unification or synthesizing of sensations, and this process or act is again distinct from sensing and certainly is not part of the sensation itself. Again evoking an image of Kant in the reader, Solovyov calls the independent cognitive act whereby sense data are formed into definite objective representations the imagination.

The two factors we have discerned, one contributed by the epistemic subject and the other by sensation, are absolutely independent of each other. Cognition requires both, but what connects them remains unanswered. According to Solovyov, any connection implies dependence, but the a priori element certainly cannot be dependent on the empirical. For, following Hume, from the factual we cannot deduce the universality and the necessity of a law. The other alternative is to have the content of true cognition dependent on the forms of reason; such is the approach of Hegel's absolute rationalism. However, if all the determinations of being are created by cognition, then at the beginning we have only the pure form of cognition, pure thought, a concept of being in general. Solovyov finds such a starting point to be vacuous. For although Hegel correctly realizes the general form of truth to be universality, it is a negative conception from which nothing can be derived. The positive conception is a whole that contains everything in itself, not, as in Hegel, one that everything contains in itself.

For Solovyov, truth, in short, is the whole, and, consequently, each particular fact in isolation from the whole is false. Again Solovyov's position on rationality bears an uncanny resemblance to that of Hegel, although in the former's eyes this resemblance is superficial. Reason is the whole, and so the rationality of a particular fact lies in its interrelation with the whole. A fact divorced from the whole is irrational.

True knowledge implies the whole, the truly existent, the absolute. Following Solovyov's "dialectical" thinking, the absolute, qua absolute, presupposes a non-absolute; one (or the whole) presupposes the many. And, again conjuring up visions of Hegel, if the absolute is the one, the non-absolute is becoming the one. The latter can become the one only if it has the divine element potentially. In nature, the one exists only potentially, whereas in humans it is actual, though only ideally, i.e., in consciousness.

The object of knowledge has three forms: 1) as it appears to us empirically, 2) as conceptually ideal, and 3) as existing absolutely independent of our cognition of it. Our concepts and sensations would be viewed merely as subjective states were it not for the third form. The basis for this form is a third sort of cognition, without which objective truth would elude us. A study of the history of philosophy correctly shows that neither the senses nor the intellect, whether separately or in combination, can satisfactorily account for the third form. Sensations are relative, and concepts conditional. Indeed, the referral of our thoughts and sensations to an object in knowledge, thus, presupposes this third sort of cognition. Such cognition, namely, faith or mystical knowledge, would itself be impossible if the subject and the object of knowledge were completely divorced. In this interaction we perceive the object's essence or "idea," its constancy. The imagination (here, let us recall Kant), at a non-conscious level, organizes the manifold given by sense experience into an object via a referral of this manifold to the "idea" of the object.

Solovyov believes he has demonstrated that all knowledge arises through the confluence of empirical, rational and "mystical" elements. Only philosophical analysis can discover the role of the mystical. Just as an isolation of the first two elements has historically led to empiricism and rationalism respectively, so the mystical element has been accentuated by traditional theology. And just as the former directions have given rise to dogmatic manifestations, so too has theology found its dogmatic exponents. The task before us lies in freeing the three directions of their exclusiveness, intentionally integrating and organizing true knowledge into a complete system, which Solovyov called "free theosophy."

6. The Justification of the Good

After the completion of the works mentioned above, Solovyov largely withdrew from philosophy, both as a profession and its concerns. During the 1880s he devoted himself increasingly to theological and topical social issues of little, if any, concern to the contemporary philosopher. However, in 1894 Solovyov took to preparing a second edition of the Critique of Abstract Principles. Owing, though, to an evolution, and thereby significant changes, in his viewpoint, he soon abandoned this venture and embarked on an entirely new statement of his philosophical views. Just as in his earlier treatise, Solovyov again intended to treat ethical issues before turning to an epistemological inquiry.

The Justification of the Good appeared in book form in 1897. Many, though not all, of its chapters had previously been published in several well-known philosophical and literary journals over the course of the previous three years. Largely in response to criticisms of the book or its serialized chapters, Solovyov managed to complete a second edition, which was published in 1899 and accompanied by a new preface.

Most notably, Solovyov now holds that ethics is an independent discipline. In this he finds himself in solidarity with Kant, who made this "great discovery," as Solovyov put it. Knowledge of good and evil is accessible to all individuals possessing reason and a conscience and needs neither divine revelation nor epistemological deduction. Although philosophical analysis surely is unable to instill a certainty that I, the analyst, alone exist, solipsism even if true would eliminate only objective ethics. There is another, a subjective side to ethics that concerns duties to oneself. Likewise, morality is independent of the metaphysical question concerning freedom of the will. From the independence of ethics Solovyov draws the conclusion that life has meaning and, coupled with this, we can legitimately speak of a moral order.

The natural bases of morality, from which ethics as an independent discipline can be deduced and which form the basis of moral consciousness, are shame, pity and reverence. Shame reveals to man his higher human dignity. It sets the human apart from the animal world. Pity forms the basis of all of man's social relations to others. Reverence establishes the moral basis of man's relation to that which is higher to himself and, as such, is the root of religion.

Each of the three bases, Solovyov tells us, may be considered from three sides or points of view. Shame as a virtue reveals itself as modesty, pity as compassion and reverence as piety. All other proposed virtues are essentially expressions of one of these three. The other two points of view, as a principle of action and as a condition of an ensuing moral action, are interconnected with the first such that the first logically contains the others.

Interestingly, truthfulness is not itself a formal virtue. Solovyov opposes one sort of extreme ethical formalism, arguing that making a factually false statement is not always a lie in the moral sense. The nature of the will behind the action must be taken into account.

Likewise, despite his enormous respect for Kant's work in the field of ethics, Solovyov rejects viewing God and the immortality of the soul as postulates. God's existence, he tells us, is not a deduction from religious feeling or experience but its immediate content, i.e., that which is experienced. Furthermore, he adds that God and the soul are "direct creative forces of moral reality." How we are to interpret these claims in light of the supposed independence of ethics is contentious unless, of course, we find Solovyov guilty of simple-mindedness. Indeed one of his own friends [Trubeckoj] wrote: "It is not difficult to convince ourselves that these arguments about the independence of ethics are refuted on every later page in the Justification of the Good." However we look upon Solovyov's pronouncements, the Deity plays a significant role in his ethics. Solovyov provides a facile answer to the perennial question of how a morally perfect God can permit the existence of evil: Its elimination would mean the annihilation of human freedom thereby rendering free goodness (good without freedom is imperfect) impossible. Thus, God permits evil, because its removal would be a greater evil.

Often, all too often, Solovyov is prone to express himself in metaphysical, indeed theological, terms that do little to clarify his position. The realization of the Kingdom of God, he tells us, is the goal of life. What he means, however, is that the realization of a perfect moral order, in which the relations between individuals and the collective whole's relations to each individual are morally correct, is all that can be rationally desired. Each of us understands that the attainment of moral perfection is not a solipsistic enterprise, i.e., that the Kingdom of God can only be achieved if we each want it and collectively attain it. The individual can attain the moral ideal only in and through society. Christianity alone offers the idea of the perfect individual and the perfect society. Other ideas have been presented (Solovyov mentions Buddhism and Platonism), of course, and these have been historically necessary for the attainment of the universal human consciousness that Christianity promises.

Man's correct relations to God, his fellow humans and his own material nature, in accordance with the three foundations of morality – piety, pity (compassion) and shame – are collectively organized in three forms. The Church is collectively organized piety, whereas the state is collectively organized pity or compassion. To view the state in such terms already tells us a great deal concerning how Solovyov views the state's mission and, consequently, his general stand toward laissez-faire doctrines. Although owing to the connection between legality and morality one can speak of a Christian state, this is not to say that in pre-Christian times the state had no moral foundations. Just as the pagan can know the moral law "written in his heart," (an expression of St. Paul's that Solovyov was fond of invoking but also reminiscent of Kant's "the moral law within") so too the pagan state has two functions: 1) to preserve the foundation of social life necessary for continued human existence, and 2) to improve the condition of humanity.

At the end of The Justification of the Good Solovyov attempts in the most cursory fashion to make a transition to epistemology. He claims that the struggle between good and evil raises the question of the latter's origin, which in turn ultimately requires an epistemological inquiry. That ethics is an independent discipline does not mean that it is not connected to metaphysics and the theory of knowledge. One can study ethics in its entirety without first having answers to all other philosophical problems much as one can be an excellent swimmer without knowing the physics of buoyancy.

7. Theoretical Philosophy

During the last few years of his life Solovyov sought to recast his thoughts on epistemology. Surely he intended to publish in serial fashion the various chapters of a planned book on the topic, much as he did The Justification of the Good. Unfortunately at the time of his death in 1900 only three chapters were completed, and it is only on the basis of these that we can judge his new standpoint. Nevertheless, on the basis of these meager writings we can already see that Solovyov's new epistemological reflections exhibit a greater transformation of his thoughts on the subject than does his ethics. Whereas a suggested affinity between these ideas and later German phenomenology must be viewed with caution and, in light of his earlier thoughts, a measure of skepticism, there can be little doubt that to all appearances Solovyov spoke and thought in this late work in a philosophical idiom close to that with which we have become familiar in the 20th century.

For Solovyov epistemology concerns itself with the validity of knowledge in itself, that is, not in terms of whether it is useful in practice or provides a basis for an ethical system that has for whatever reason been accepted. Perhaps not surprisingly then, particularly in light of his firm religious views, Solovyov adheres to a correspondence theory, saying that knowledge is the agreement of a thought of an object with the actual object. The open questions are how such an agreement is possible and how do we know that we know.

The Cartesian "I think, therefore I am" leads us virtually nowhere. Admittedly the claim contains indubitable knowledge, but it is merely that of a subjective reality. I might just as well be thinking of an illusory book as of an actually existing one. How do we get beyond the "I think"? How do we distinguish a dream from reality? The criteria are not present in the immediacy of the consciously intended object. To claim as did some Russian philosophers in his own day that the reality of the external world is an immediately given fact appears to Solovyov an arbitrary opinion hardly worthy of philosophy. Nor is it possible to deduce from the Cartesian inference that the I is a thinking substance. Here is the root of Descartes' error. The self discovered in self-consciousness has the same status as the object of consciousness, i.e., both have phenomenal existence. If we cannot say what this object of my consciousness is like in itself, i.e., apart from my conscious acts, so too we cannot say what the subject of consciousness is apart from consciousness and for the same reason. Likewise, just as we cannot speak about the I in itself, so too we cannot answer to whom consciousness belongs.

In "The Reliability of Reason," the second article comprising the Theoretical Philosophy, Solovyov concerns himself with affirming the universality of logical thought. In doing so he stands in opposition to the popular reductionisms, e.g., psychologism, that sought to deny any extra-temporal significance to logic. Thought itself, Solovyov tells us, requires recollection, language and intentionality. Since any logical thought is, nevertheless, a thought and since thought can be analyzed in terms of psychic functions, one could conceivably charge Solovyov with lapsing back into a psychologism, in precisely the same way as some critics have charged Husserl with doing so. And much the same defenses of Husserl's position can also be used in reply to the objection against Solovyov's stance.

The third article, "The Form of Rationality and the Reason of Truth," published in 1898, concerns itself with the proper starting points of epistemology. The first such point is the indubitable veracity of the given in immediate consciousness. There can be no doubt that the pain I experience upon stubbing my toe is genuine. The second starting point of epistemology is the objective, universal validity of rational thought. Along with Hume and Kant, Solovyov does not dispute that factual experience can provide claims only to conditional generality. Rationality alone provides universality. This universality, however, is merely formal. To distinguish the rational form from the conditional content of thought is the first essential task of philosophy. Taking up this challenge is the philosophical self or subject. Solovyov concludes, again as he always does, with a triadic distinction between the empirical subject, the logical subject and the philosophical subject. And although he labels the first the "soul," the second the "mind" and the third the "spirit," the trichotomy is contrived and the labeling, at best, imaginative with no foundation other than in Solovyov's a priori architectonic.

8. Concluding Remarks

Solovyov's relatively early death, brought on to some degree by his erratic life-style, precluded the completion of his last philosophical work. He also intended to turn his attention eventually towards aesthetics, but whether he would ever have been able to complete such a project remains doubtful. Solovyov was never at any stage of his development able to complete a systematic treatise on the topic, although he did publish a number of writings on the subject.

However beneficial our reading of Solovyov's works may be, there can be little doubt that he was very much a 19th-century figure. We can hardly take seriously his incessant predilection for triadic schemes, far in excess to anything similar in the German Idealists. His choice of terminology, drawn from an intellectual fashion of his day, also poses a formidable obstacle to the contemporary reader.

Lastly, despite, for example, an often perspicacious study of his philosophical predecessors, written during his middle years, Solovyov, in clinging obstinately to his rigid architectonic, failed to penetrate further than they. Indeed, he often fell far short of their achievements. His discussion of imagination, for example, as we saw, is much too superficial, adding nothing to that found in Kant. These shortcomings, though, should not divert us from recognizing his genuinely useful insights.

After his death, with interest surging in the mystical amid abundant decadent trends, so characteristic of decaying cultures, Solovyov's thought was seized upon by those far less interested in philosophical analysis than he was towards the end. Those who invoked his name so often in the years immediately subsequent to his death stressed the religious strivings of his middle years to the complete neglect of his final philosophical project, let alone its continuation and completion. In terms of Solovyov-studies today the philosophical project of discovering the "rational kernel within the mystical shell" [Marx], of separating the "living from the dead" [Croce], remains not simply unfulfilled but barely begun.

9. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Sobranie sochinenij, St. Petersburg: Prosveshchenie, 1911-14.
  • Sobranie sochinenij, Brussels: Zhizn s Bogom, 1966-70.ENGLISH TRANSLATIONS
  • The Crisis of Western Philosophy (Against the Positivists), trans. by Boris Jakim, Hudson, NY: Lindisfarne Press, 1996.
  • Lectures on Divine Humanity, ed. by Boris Jakim, Lindisfarne Press, 1995.
  • The Justification of the Good, trans. by N. Duddington, New York: Macmillan, 1918.
  • "Foundations of Theoretical Philosophy," trans. by Vlada Tolley and James P. Scanlan, in Russian Philosophy, ed. James
  • M. Edie, et al., Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1965, vol. III, pp. 99-134.

b. Secondary Sources (mentioned above)

  • Helmut Dahm, Vladimir Solovyev and Max Scheler: Attempt at a Comparative Interpretation, Dordrecht, Holland: D. Reidel Publishing Company, 1975.
  • Zdenek V. David, "The Influence of Jacob Boehme on Russian Religious Thought," Slavic Review, 21(1962), 1, pp. 43-64.
  • Aleksej Losev, Vladimir Solov'ev, Moscow: Mysl', 1983.
  • Ludolf Mueller, Solovjev und der Protestantismus, Freiburg: Verlag Herder, 1951.
  • Joseph L. Navickas, "Hegel and the Doctrine of Historicity of Vladimir Solovyov," in The Quest for the Absolute, ed.
  • Frederick J. Adelmann, The Hague: M. Nijhoff, 1966, pp. 135-154.
  • Louis J. Shein, "V.S. Solov'ev's Epistemology: A Re-examination," Canadian Slavic Studies, Spring 1970, vol. 4, no. 1, pp. 1-16.
  • E. N. Trubeckoj, Mirosozercanie V. S. Solov'eva, 2 vols., Moscow: Izdatel'stvo "Medium," 1995,
  • Aleksandr I. Vvedenskij, "O misticizme i kriticizme v teorii poznanija V. S. Solov'eva," Filosofskie ocherki, Prague: Plamja, 1924, pp. 45-71.

Author Information

Thomas Nemeth
U. S. A.

Benedict de Spinoza: Political Philosophy

spinozaThe body of Benedict de Spinoza’s writings on political philosophy in the 17th century should be seen as a paradigmatic species of European Enlightenment Philosophy. Spinoza rejected the teleological account of human nature and its implications to political societies in favor of rational, scientific understanding with its contractual implications. Hence, political societies to Spinoza are not natural organisms but artificial entities “designed” and “manufactured” by human beings for certain ends. Such designs are, however, constrained by an understanding of human nature. It is, indeed, Spinoza’s conception of human nature that forms the foundation for his political philosophy.One of the aims of Spinoza’s political writings is to demonstrate that, given the central role played by emotions in human motivations, political authority is a necessary evil. Human beings, as they are, are not the kind of beings capable of surviving without it. In addition, Spinoza does not think that politics are good for much more besides keeping us from chaos, murder, anarchy. In this, he is in agreement with Thomas Hobbes. On the other hand, if Spinoza affirms security as the fundamental political value, as will be argued, he does not necessarily think that such a value is consistent only with a certain form of government. In this he differs from Hobbes.

It is only once we understand Spinoza’s picture of what human beings are like, particularly the source of their motivations, that we are in a position to derive the ends of political societies, which in turn leads us to explain the sources and justification of political authority, and why Spinoza is ultimately non-committal as to the kind of political form best embodying the endorsed fundamental political values.

Table of Contents

  1. Human Nature
    1. Interpretation of the Conatus Principle
    2. Ethical Egoism and the Salience of Passions
  2. The Necessity for Political Authority: State of Nature
    1. Objective Account
    2. Psychological Account
  3. The Transition from State of Nature to Political Authority: The Social Contract
    1. Civil vs. Natural Rights in Locke
    2. Civil vs. Natural Rights in Spinoza
    3. Transfer of Powers or Abilities
  4. Obligations
    1. Citizens
    2. Sovereign
  5. The Purpose and Preferred Form of Political Authority
  6. Conclusion
  7. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Human Nature

Spinoza’s political philosophy proceeds from the idea, also found in Hobbes, that political ends, or goals, should be derived from understanding human nature such as it is, and not as it should or could be. This fundamental starting point can be contrasted with a utopian tradition of political philosophy emblematic, for example, in Plato’s Republic and the early writings of Karl Marx. While utopian political philosophers argue that correct political institutions can transform human nature into something more desirable or virtuous than its current state, Spinoza instead commences with a contrarian conviction, by and large rejecting such a possibility. This conviction proceeds from Spinoza’s interpretation of human nature.

a. Interpretation of the Conatus Principle

Human nature, according to Spinoza, must be studied and understood just like the nature of any other organism in the universe, in the following sense; human beings are subsumed in nature along with all other natural organisms and cannot thus transcend, and are therefore subject to, natural laws. This includes our nature as physiological beings and as psychological and cognitive beings. Furthermore, the laws of nature are to be understood, according to Spinoza, in a non-teleological fashion. Nature/God does not act with an end in view; hence, human nature cannot be derived from any such purposes. Instead, the most fundamental principle guiding all organisms, and therefore also human beings is what Spinoza calls the Conatus Principle:

Each thing, as far as it can by its own power, strives to persevere in being. (E:III:P6)

While it is not immediately obvious how Spinoza intends to support this principle when it comes to the kinds of organisms called human beings—particularly in the context of political philosophy—it later becomes clear that the principle, in its current and descriptive, form, is intended epistemologically as an a priori analytic proposition, or a necessary truth:

Since reason demands nothing contrary to Nature, it demands that everyone love himself, seek his own advantage, what is really useful to him, want what will really lead a man to greater perfection, and absolutely, that everyone should strive to preserve his own being as far as he can. This, indeed, is as necessarily true as that the whole is greater than its part. (E: IV:P18S)

Hence, the Conatus principle, when applied in the context of human beings, appears to describe human beings as egoistic beings. This, as stated, is intended as a truth not based upon empirical observation or self-reflection, but put forth as a necessary truth—a truth as necessary as the truth that the whole is greater than its part. According to the descriptive interpretation of the principle (E:III:P6), we are necessarily egoistic creatures. However, the quoted passage from (E:IV:P18S) also gives credence to a prescriptive understanding of the Conatus principle, for Spinoza says that “everyone should strive to preserve his own being as far as he can.” On this reading, we should always act according to our self-interest. This position is known as ethical egoism since it urges us to be egoists rather than describing us as already being egoists.

Now, if both of these interpretations of the Conatus Principle are plausible, then we need an answer to the following question: If the descriptive interpretation tells us that we are necessarily actuated by the Principle, then why bother prescribing this action as desirable? That is, if we already necessarily act in accordance with the descriptive version of the Conatus Principle, then why are we also urged to act this way? Urging us to do something we already necessarily do is surely redundant.

One way out of this dilemma might be to say that the prescriptive version of the Conatus Principle is necessary because we do not, in fact, in all circumstances, act in accordance with our self-interest. Because we do not do so, Spinoza is urging us to do so. This interpretation would certainly be in agreement with the empirical reality of human motivations. We certainly do not always act in ways that are conducive to the sustenance and enhancement of our being. Self-sacrificing behavior, such as sacrificing one’s life for one’s family, friend, or nation is all too familiar. Surely Spinoza was aware of such actions. But if this is true, then why advance the descriptive version of the Conatus Principle at all? After all, if it can be refuted through empirical counterexamples, then isn’t this enough to show that this version of the principle is simply false? But Spinoza does not, as we have seen, advance the principle as an a posteriori truth, but as an a priori truth. Hence offering empirical counterexamples appears to be beside the point, and offering this way out of the dilemma will thus not do. But if it is indeed true, that we do not always act in accordance with our self-interest, then just what is the force and the meaning of the a priori descriptive version of the Conatus principle?

Perhaps the solution is to say that the prescriptive version of the Conatus principle is intended to us human beings as empirical, affective beings while the descriptive version of the principle is intended for what humanity could look like, if ideally rational. So, on this reading, Spinoza is urging us to act according to the dictates of ethical egoism since we, as empirical beings primarily motivated by our desires, sometimes fail to do so. This does not change the fact that we do act according to the principles of self-interest more often than not; it simply means that we do not always know what is in our best interest—since we are not ideally rational.

If this is plausible, then the descriptive version of the principle could indeed be interpreted as a metaphysical truth necessarily true for ideal humans, and not as a psychological truth. Fully rational individuals will never fail to seek whatever aids or enhances their being. But this would not be the case for beings like us, who need to be exhorted into self-interested behavior. If this is correct, the descriptive version of the principle describes human beings in their ideal state while the prescriptive version of the principle is designed for humans in their current state. Therefore, it is the prescriptive version of the Conatus Principle that is mainly of importance for the purposes of political philosophy.

b. Ethical Egoism and the Salience of Passions

If the prescriptive interpretation of the Conatus Principle is correct for all imperfect human beings, then Spinoza is pressing us to act in accordance with our best interests. This is not, however, tantamount to telling us to act selfishly or to see ourselves as individualistic, non-social beings. In fact, it is Spinoza’s thesis that acting in a selfish or individualistic manner is not in our best interest and hence a violation of the dictates of the Conatus Principle. And the reason why humans do not see what is in their best interests is due to the centrality of passions in their very being:

But human nature is framed in a different fashion: every one, indeed, seeks his own interest, but does not do so in accordance with the dictates of sound reason, for most men’s ideas of desirability and usefulness are guided by their fleshly instincts and emotions, which take no thought beyond the present and immediate object. (TP: V:72-73)

On the other hand, acting according to the Conatus Principle—and hence in one’s best interest--is to act in accordance with the dictates of sound reason. And to act in accordance with the dictates of sound reason is to realize the impossibility of persevering in one’s being without mutual assistance. Providing mutual assistance is in the best interest of human beings. Indeed, Spinoza argues that it is necessary for even providing the basic needs for survival (TP:V:73). Spinoza wants us to act in accordance with the principle of ethical egoism while arguing that it is precisely this that we are not capable of doing because of our “fleshy instincts and emotions” which run fundamentally counter to the social dictates of reason.

The anti-social nature of our passions is also an inevitable source of conflict:

In so far as men are tormented by anger, envy, or any passion implying hatred, they are drawn asunder and made contrary one to another, and therefore are so much the more to be feared, as they are more powerful, crafty, and cunning than the other animals. And because men are in the highest degree liable to these passions, therefore men are naturally enemies. (PT: II: 296)

This emphasis on the passions as the cause for conflict implies that ideally, if guided by full reason, human beings might be capable of avoiding conflict. Again, to act fully in accordance with the dictates of reason is to avoid conflict as was demonstrated above. Conflict does not enhance one’s being; quite to the contrary—it can annihilate one’s being. So, the emphasis on Spinoza’s ethical egoism is on the “ethical” since such behavior, instead of resulting in conflict, would embrace the social values of stability and harmony.

2. The Necessity for Political Authority: State of Nature

a. Objective Account

Spinoza’s description of human beings as “natural enemies,” and the consequent inevitability of conflict is an account of the human condition in a state of nature. This is mostly a non-historical, “conceptual device” used to depict the human condition in the absence of political authority. While Spinoza’s use of it is unsystematic compared to Hobbes and Locke, he nevertheless presumes something like it, and argues, along with Hobbes and Locke, that political authority is necessary for the survival of human societies: “[n]o society can exist without government, and force, and laws to restrain and repress men’s desires and immoderate impulses.” (TP:V: 74). Again, it is our affective nature that gets us into trouble. Since human beings are motivated by their self-interested desires for which they seek immediate gratification, they cannot exist without government. Thus, Spinoza rejects the possibility of anarchism for human beings primarily motivated by their desires as we have seen, this is not necessarily the case for fully rational beings).

Spinoza’s account here closely resembles that of Hobbes who similarly argued that human life without political authority would be undesirable due to the nature of human desires. Famously, such a life would be “solitary, poor, nasty, brutish, and short.” (Leviathan: I: xiii, p. 76). Spinoza also significantly agrees with Hobbes that it is the individual who decides what is in his or her best interest in a given situation and can hence procure his or her interests by force, cunning, entreaty or any other means (TP: XVI: 202).

b. Psychological Account

Third-person explanations of why political authority would be necessary for creatures like us has not yet to offer a first-person explanation, from the point of view of the very individuals in state of nature, of why they would actually prefer living under conditions of political authority rather than under the conditions of anarchy. Spinoza’s explanation of this proceeds from what he regards as self-evident, axiomatic laws of human psychology.

Spinoza argues that no one ever neglects what he regards as good, except with the hope of gaining something even better, or for the fear of some greater evil; and no one ever endures and evil, except for the sake of even greater evil, or gaining something good (TP: XVI: 203). The corollary of this is that all of us, given a choice of two goods, choose the one we think is the greatest and, given a choice of two evils, choose the least evil. When we combine this axiom with the Conatus Principle, we can see that we determine what is good and what is evil for us by judging what is most or least conducive to our survival.

Now, Spinoza argues, based upon this psychological axiom, that we would forsake the state of nature in favor of some form of political authority, because we would judge the situation under political authority to be a greater good (or a lesser evil) than the state of nature. But why would we judge the affair this way? Why not favor the state of nature over political authority? While Spinoza is not explicit regarding this matter, he nevertheless alludes to the fact that it is worse—again, from the point of view of our survival—to be at the mercy of innumerable individuals than at the mercy of one single entity: the state (TP: XVI: 202-3). Admittedly, this seems far from obvious as Locke argued later, but Spinoza might defend this conclusion on the grounds that dispersion of potential evil is more difficult to countenance than a concentration of potential evil. At least, in this way, while one may not necessarily be able to do anything about it, one can at least know where the potential evil is coming from.

3. The Transition from State of Nature to Political Authority: The Social Contract

It is clear, from the foregoing, that Spinoza’s rejection of anarchy is based upon the conjunction of the Conatus Principle and his psychological axiom. It is also clear that political authority for Spinoza is not something intrinsically good or desirable, but a necessary evil. It is the least evil choice of two evils. By utilizing the “state of nature” device, Spinoza is also implicitly conceding that the state is not a natural organism but an artificial entity “designed” and “manufactured” by human beings. While these considerations answer the ontological status of the state and why political authority is necessary at all, it is still necessary to see what Spinoza’s view is on the transfer of power from the state-of-nature-individuals to the state. Here it is perhaps useful to illuminate Spinoza’s position by briefly contrasting it to another social contract theorist, John Locke.

a. Civil vs. Natural Rights in Locke

Locke held that the state of nature was conditioned by what he called “law of nature” and that these natural laws could be discovered by reason. Two of the most important natural laws for our comparative purposes, mentioned by Locke, were (a) that no one ought to harm another in his or her life, health, liberty, or possessions; and (b) that should such violations occur, everyone had the right to punish the transgressor(s). The first of these laws indicate that human beings in state of nature possess rights to life, health, liberty, and possessions, and that it is wrong to violate such rights. So, while the state of nature for Locke is non-political, it is far from being non-moral: moral terms and actions are applicable in the non-political, state-of-nature realm. Now, while human beings can and do sometimes act morally in the state of nature, Locke also recognizes that often this will not be the case, and because of this, the survival of the individual is much more likely under a political authority which would possess a monopoly on punishment. So, according to Locke, humans still retain their rights to life, health, liberty, and possessions (this is collective called “property” in Locke’s theory) in the political realm. Such natural rights are now expressed through the form of civil rights in positive law. So, the distinction between natural and civil rights in Locke is derived from the distinction between natural law and positive law. Furthermore, it is clear that Locke regards such rights as moral constraints on the political realm; there are natural moral limits to what the state can do.

In contrast to our retention of the natural rights to property expressed through civil laws, we do not retain our right to punish the transgressors of property rights according to Locke. Instead, it is precisely our abrogation of the right to punish which is transferred to a state that makes the political realm possible.

b. Civil vs. Natural Rights in Spinoza

Unlike Locke, Spinoza makes no distinction between natural law and civil law, nor the corollary derivatives of natural rights and civil rights. Spinoza undermines such distinctions by arguing that “right” is simply synonymous with any agent’s “power” or “ability.” So, for Spinoza, to say that someone has a natural right to life, liberty, health, and possessions, is just to say that someone has a power to preserve their life, liberty, health, and possessions—to the best of their ability. In other words, our “right” to self-preservation is coextensive with our “power” or with our “ability” for self-preservation; “…the rights of an individual extend to the utmost limits of its power as it has been conditioned [by nature].” (TP: XVI: 200)

Denying such a distinction already foreshadows Spinoza’s refusal to regard the state of nature in Lockean terms, as a non-political but moral sphere. Instead, Spinoza is insistent that the state of nature is both a non-political and a non-moral sphere; “The state of nature…must be conceived as without either religion or law, and consequently without sin or wrong” (TP: XVI: 210). So, moral terms proper, such as “right,” “wrong,” “just,” and “unjust” are inconceivable in the state of nature. It is not just that there are no limits to what we can do to one another in state of nature; it is also the case that ordinary moral terms do not possess any meaning. Hence, it follows from that that “the right and ordinance of nature, under which all men are born, and under which they mostly live, only prohibits such things as no one desires, and no one can attain: it does not forbid strife, nor hatred, nor anger, nor deceit, nor indeed, any of the means suggested by desire…” (TP: XVI: 202).

To use Spinoza’s parlance, everyone has a “right” to act deceitfully, angrily, discordantly, violently, etc. towards others, or in general, in whatever manner they see fit as long as they are able to do so; their rights are only limited by their ability. As such, the only things we do not have a “right” to in the state of nature are things that none of us wants anyway, or things that are impossible for us to attain.

c. Transfer of Powers or Abilities

Although Spinoza would agree with Locke that the reasons for forsaking the state of nature comes from potentially enhanced capacities for self-preservation under political authority, it is less clear how Spinoza accounts for this transition. At first blush, it looks as if Spinoza is simply offering a story very similar to Locke’s: the political realm is made possible by the transference of our natural rights to punish. In this case, the use of force would belong solely to the state, just as it does in Locke’s account. However, as explained earlier, this right is conceived by Spinoza in manner very different from that of Locke. For while Locke thinks that the right to punish the transgressor of one’s rights is a natural, moral right, having nothing necessarily to do with whether one in fact is capable of punishing or not, in Spinoza’s conceptual apparatus this right is, once again, synonymous with one’s power or ability to punish the transgressor. One only has the “right” to the extent that one possesses the power. In other words, no ability or capacity, no “right.” Due to Spinoza’s identification of “right” and “power,” the transition from the non-political and the non-moral-state-of-nature to the political and moral sphere of the state does not appear to take place through the abrogation of our “right” to punish, as it does in Locke. Rather, if the interpretation is correct, Spinoza is committed to the position that, instead of our natural moral rights, we are in fact transferring our powers or capacities.

But there is a sense in which this is hardly intelligible. For one can argue that “powers” or “abilities” or “capacities” are not the kinds of things that is possible to transfer. One’s capacity to walk, for example, cannot be transferred to another in the sense that once the transfer has taken place, the agent having transferred the capacity no longer is able to walk while the agent having received the capacity now is able to walk. One can only lose one’s capacity (for example, when one is dead) but not transfer it. The same considerations are applicable to one’s capacity to defend oneself: one can lose that capacity but not transfer it. So, Spinoza’s identification of “right” with one’s power or ability does not seem to allow him to make the concept of transferring this “right” intelligible.

A distinction between “power” and the “use-of-power” is necessary. With such a distinction, Spinoza could make the transition from state of nature to a political sphere more plausible since he could now concede that while one cannot indeed transfer “powers” or “capacities,” one can nevertheless transfer one’s use of those powers and capacities. On this interpretation, the Lockean rights to life, liberty, health, and possession, would be understood by Spinoza not as one’s ability to defend or enhance one’s rights, liberties, health, and possessions, but instead as the actual use of that ability.

4. Obligations

The notion of obligations in Spinoza is relevant only in the political realm, not in the state of nature since, as we have seen, the state of nature for Spinoza is not only a nonpolitical but also a non-moral realm. The orthodox story about obligations tells us they are customarily derived from either voluntary agreements or someone having certain rights. Thus, if two parties voluntary agree to a contract, e.g. marriage, then the two parties incur obligations stipulated in the contract; or, for example, if someone has a right to free speech, then it is everybody’s obligation not to interfere with that someone’s right. That is the traditional story. But since Spinoza has argued that rights are synonymous with power, his story about obligations is anything but traditional. We shall take a look at obligations with respect to the relation between citizens and the sovereign.

a. Citizens

Spinoza stated that all contracts or promises derive their obligations from utility. Utility or disutility of a contract, in turn, is decided by the application of the aforementioned psychological axiom which tells us that no one ever neglects what he regards as good, except with the hope of gaining something even better, or for the fear of some greater evil; and no one ever endures and evil, except for the sake of even greater evil, or gaining something good. According to Spinoza, we have an obligation to fulfill a contract only if the violation of the contract would not gain us something better, or if the violation of the contract would result in a greater evil. If either or both conditions hold, then we a “right” to violate the contract (TP:XVI:203-205). The implication of such an analysis is, at the very least, that all contracts are revocable at any time, subject to the kind of analysis stated.

Now, with respect to the specific contract in question here, the contract to transfer our use of power to a given political authority, the implication is clear: the citizen’s “obligation” to obey the authority is also contingent on the psychological axiom. “It is…foolish to ask a man to keep his faith with us forever, unless we also endeavour that the violation of the compact we enter into shall involve for the violator more harm than good” (TP:XVI:204). Spinoza, then, offers a decisive “right” to rebellion for citizens.

Spinoza’s equation of “right” to power also has implications to the issue of citizens’ obligations. If the “right” of the sovereign is also coextensive to its power, then it would seem to follow that the citizens’ obligations extend only so far as the power of the sovereign. One is “obligated” to obey the sovereign only if one does not have the power to disobey it.

b. Sovereign

Presumably the obligations and the rights of the sovereign (there is here no presupposition as to the preferred form of government—that topic is discussed later—so that by “sovereign” one could mean a democracy, monarchy, oligarchy, etc.) is subject to similar analysis as the obligations and rights of the citizens. Since the citizens’ “rights” are coextensive with their power, the sovereign’s “obligations” to the citizens are limited only by the power of both parties. On the other hand, the sovereign’s “rights” are also only limited by the powers of the respective parties. Hence, the sovereign has the right to do whatever it wants, and wherever it meets the counterforce of the citizens, there lay its obligations. Furthermore, Spinoza is also clear that the sovereign’s power is not limited by laws, but only by its intellectual and physical abilities. There are no constitutional limitations to the sovereign’s actions.

Needless to say, these are devastating implications from the point of view of individual freedom, but Spinoza is quick to point out that both the citizens and the sovereign are constrained by the Conatus Principle as well. Therefore, a sovereign concerned to advance its being will rarely impose “irrational” commands toward the citizens, because…”they are bound to consult their own interests, and retain their power by consulting the public good and acting according to the dictates of reason…(TP:XVI:205). Presumably, similar things can be asserted about the citizenry, given the caveat that they also act in accordance with the dictates of reason. However, the problem with this sort of argument is that we have already seen Spinoza’s reservations regarding the ability of humans to act in accordance with the dictates of reason, and even if this was plausible, the force of Spinoza’s argument here is purely speculative. In other words, Spinoza is not making a principled point but arguing, instead, that the kinds of irrational commands (perhaps “tyrannical” would be better) would not likely occur since the sovereign will act in accordance with his or her best interests. But this sort of argument can surely only be assessed through empirical means by consulting the available historical record regarding the purported rationality of sovereigns’ behavior, and such a record has not been kind to Spinoza’s speculative point.

These kinds of considerations demonstrate, among other things, Spinoza’s unorthodox and perhaps incoherent use of the concepts like “rights,” “obligations,” and even “contract.” After all, what exactly does the social contract that Spinoza employs accomplish since its force does not come from the contract itself but rather from the kind of cost-benefit analysis carried out by the psychological axiom? What exactly would be lost from Spinoza’s political philosophy if the notion of contract and its correlative notions were simply omitted?

5. The Purpose and Preferred Form of Political Authority

Explaining Spinoza’s political philosophy has so far concentrated on his view of the relevant features of human psychology to political theory. Humans are creatures driven by passions and desires for survival that will always be characterized by hope for something better and fear for something worse. Hence, as has been explained, none of us ever neglects what he regards as good, except with the hope of gaining something even better, or for the fear of some greater evil; and none of us ever endures an evil, except for the sake of even greater evil, or gaining something good (TP: XVI: 203). Because of these fundamental features of human psychology, we would judge the state of nature to be a greater evil, or as something worse, than living under political authority. But what exactly does the political realm offer us that we cannot enjoy without it? What is the purpose of the political realm?

One answer to this question can be gathered from the account so far. We enter into the political realm in order to secure/enhance our existence better than we could without it—given the central role of passions in our nature. This is no less than a Hobbesian answer; the purpose of the political realm is escaping perpetual war in order to secure our lives and material possessions. Spinoza confirms this view: “…for the ends of every social organization and commonwealth are…security and comfort” (TP: III: 47). To reiterate, a good society is one which will be “most secure, most stable, and least liable to reverses…” (TP: III: 46). Spinoza appears to assert security as the fundamental political value. Such an affirmation can be contrasted, on the one hand, with political thinkers like Plato, Aristotle, and Hegel, all of whom saw the realm of politics as essential to the moral realization of the individual and, on the other hand, with thinkers like Locke and Kant who emphasized the instrumental nature of the state in guaranteeing individual freedom.

In spite of these explicit pronouncements on behalf of security by Spinoza, the issue of the purpose of political authority remains controversial in Spinoza scholarship. There are many commentators who do not interpret Spinoza as a Hobbesian with respect to the ends of political authority, but instead read him either as an advocate of individual freedom or moral perfection, or perhaps as both. One of the common threads to all of these accounts is Spinoza’s alleged preference for democracy as a political form. It is argued that because Spinoza advocates democracy and the democratic political rule is most conducive to freedom or perhaps virtue, that Spinoza is therefore affirming either freedom or virtue as the fundamental political value.

There is some textual as well as inferential evidence for such views. For example, Spinoza explicitly announces democracy as the most consonant with individual liberty; “I think I have now shown sufficiently clearly the basis of a democracy: I have especially desired to do so, for I believe it to be of all forms of government the most natural, and the most consonant with individual liberty” (TP: XVI: 207). Also, because Spinoza sees only de facto human beings as motivated by their passions and self-interested desires, and claims that human beings are potentially capable of being guided by reason which dictates cooperative behavior, perhaps it is the role of politics to nudge us from the irrational, passionate creatures to rational creatures by inculcation of virtue. Either way, the argument goes, security for Spinoza is only an instrumental value, or a necessary condition for the true political ends of individual freedom or virtue.

However, while commenting on the absolute obligation to obey existing laws, Spinoza entertains an objection that his philosophy is turning subjects into slaves which sheds light to the controversy at hand. Spinoza rejects the objection as unfounded because real—or true—freedom is not freedom from the laws of the sovereign, no matter how oppressive such laws might be, but real freedom is to live “under the entire guidance of reason” (TP: XVI: 206). Indeed, Spinoza claims that freedom is specifically a private, not a political virtue while “…the virtue of the state is its security” (PT: I: 290).

But to live under the entire guidance of reason is, at least minimally, to control one’s unruly passions, whatever else it may also be. However, if this is the case, then the pressing political question must be to ask, what political form, if any, is best for achieving this kind of liberation? And the suggestion here is that there is no obvious answer to this question. One might, for example, think that an authoritarian regime might be able to restrain humans’ irrational desires more effectively than a democratic one. Or, alternatively, one might think that no political regime of any kind is necessary or sufficient for this kind of realization. So, one cannot easily claim that because Spinoza is an advocate of democracy, he is thereby accepting freedom or virtue as the fundamental political end.

There is also textual evidence for the view that Spinoza does not reject other forms of government in favor of democracy. One of the central aims of A Political Treatise is precisely to demonstrate how different forms of governments can meet the fundamental political value of stability. For example, Spinoza explains that, historically, monarchies have enjoyed the most stability of any form of government (PT: VI:317), and that their potential instability results from the divergent interests between the sovereign and the citizens. In light of this, Spinoza advises the sovereign to act in his or her own interests which is to act in the interests of the citizensIn the case of aristocracy, instability is said to result from inequality of political power among the ruling aristocrats, the remedy for which consists of equalizing such power as far as possible. Spinoza’s considered thoughts on the stability of democracy were interrupted by his untimely death, but while he thought it most consistent with freedom, he nevertheless regarded it as the most unstable of all political forms. Indeed, Spinoza comments that democracies naturally evolve into aristocracies, and aristocracies naturally evolve into monarchies. At least on one understanding of “natural,” democracies may be interpreted as less natural than aristocracies and monarchies (PT: VIII: 351).

If stability, as has been argued, is the fundamental political value for Spinoza, then many forms of government are consistent with it, and monarchies and aristocracies appear more stable than democracies.

6. Conclusion

Spinoza’s political philosophy is a logical extension of his view of human nature. To understand ends, sources, and justification of political authority, one does well to begin with the Conatus Principle and the associated psychological axioms employed by Spinoza. The source of problems for Spinoza’s political theory, specifically the moral notions of “contract,” “rights,” and “obligations” can also be traced to his view of human nature. But what needs to be adjusted? Are the problems in the political theory an indication that Spinoza’s view of human nature needs to amended, or is his view of humanity unassailable and the problems in political theory simply a part of the package?

7. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Hobbes, Thomas, Leviathan, ed. Edwin Curley, Indianapolis: Hackett, 1994.
  • Locke, John, Second Treatise of Government, ed. C.B. Macpherson, Indianapolis: Hackett, 1980.
  • Spinoza, Benedict de, A Theologico-Political Treatise and A Political Treatise, trans. R.H.M. Elwes, New York: Dover, 1951.
    • The references to the first work cited in the text as TP, chapter, page. References to the second work cited as PT, chapter, page.
  • Spinoza, Benedict de, Ethics, trans. R.H.M Elwes, New York: Dover, 1955.
    • All references to this work cited in the text as E, part, proposition.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Feuer, Lewis Samuel, Spinoza and the Rise of Liberalism, New Brunswick: Transaction Books, 1958.
  • McShea, Robert J, The Political Philosophy of Spinoza, New York: Columbia University, 1968.
  • Negri, Antonio, The Savage Anomaly: The Power of Spinoza’s Methaphysics and Politics, Minneapolis: University of Minnesota, 1991.
  • Rosen, Stanley, “Benedict Spinoza” in History of Political Philosophy, eds. Leo Strauss, Robert Cropsey, Chicago: University of Chicago, 1987.

Author Information

Jari Niemi
Florida Atlantic University
U. S. A.

Jeremy Bentham (1748—1832)

benthamJeremy Bentham was an English philosopher and political radical. He is primarily known today for his moral philosophy, especially his principle of utilitarianism, which evaluates actions based upon their consequences. The relevant consequences, in particular, are the overall happiness created for everyone affected by the action. Influenced by many enlightenment thinkers, especially empiricists such as John Locke and David Hume, Bentham developed an ethical theory grounded in a largely empiricist account of human nature. He famously held a hedonistic account of both motivation and value according to which what is fundamentally valuable and what ultimately motivates us is pleasure and pain. Happiness, according to Bentham, is thus a matter of experiencing pleasure and lack of pain.

Although he never practiced law, Bentham did write a great deal of philosophy of law, spending most of his life critiquing the existing law and strongly advocating legal reform. Throughout his work, he critiques various natural accounts of law which claim, for example, that liberty, rights, and so on exist independent of government. In this way, Bentham arguably developed an early form of what is now often called "legal positivism." Beyond such critiques, he ultimately maintained that putting his moral theory into consistent practice would yield results in legal theory by providing justification for social, political, and legal institutions.

Bentham's influence was minor during his life. But his impact was greater in later years as his ideas were carried on by followers such as John Stuart Mill, John Austin, and other consequentialists.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Method
  3. Human Nature
  4. Moral Philosophy
  5. Political Philosophy
    1. Law, Liberty and Government
    2. Rights
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Bentham's Works
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Life

A leading theorist in Anglo-American philosophy of law and one of the founders of utilitarianism, Jeremy Bentham was born in Houndsditch, London on February 15, 1748. He was the son and grandson of attorneys, and his early family life was colored by a mix of pious superstition (on his mother's side) and Enlightenment rationalism (from his father). Bentham lived during a time of major social, political and economic change. The Industrial Revolution (with the massive economic and social shifts that it brought in its wake), the rise of the middle class, and revolutions in France and America all were reflected in Bentham's reflections on existing institutions. In 1760, Bentham entered Queen's College, Oxford and, upon graduation in 1764, studied law at Lincoln's Inn. Though qualified to practice law, he never did so. Instead, he devoted most of his life to writing on matters of legal reform—though, curiously, he made little effort to publish much of what he wrote.

Bentham spent his time in intense study, often writing some eight to twelve hours a day. While most of his best known work deals with theoretical questions in law, Bentham was an active polemicist and was engaged for some time in developing projects that proposed various practical ideas for the reform of social institutions. Although his work came to have an important influence on political philosophy, Bentham did not write any single text giving the essential principles of his views on this topic. His most important theoretical work is the Introduction to the Principles of Morals and Legislation (1789), in which much of his moral theory—which he said reflected "the greatest happiness principle"—is described and developed.

In 1781, Bentham became associated with the Earl of Shelburne and, through him, came into contact with a number of the leading Whig politicians and lawyers. Although his work was admired by some at the time, Bentham's ideas were still largely unappreciated. In 1785, he briefly joined his brother Samuel in Russia, where he pursued his writing with even more than his usual intensity, and he devised a plan for the now infamous "Panopticon"—a model prison where all prisoners would be observable by (unseen) guards at all times—a project which he had hoped would interest the Czarina Catherine the Great. After his return to England in 1788, and for some 20 years thereafter, Bentham pursued—fruitlessly and at great expense—the idea of the panopticon. Fortunately, an inheritance received in 1796 provided him with financial stability. By the late 1790s, Bentham's theoretical work came to have a more significant place in political reform. Still, his influence was, arguably, still greater on the continent. (Bentham was made an honorary citizen of the fledgling French Republic in 1792, and his The Theory of Legislation was published first, in French, by his Swiss disciple, Etienne Dumont, in 1802.)

The precise extent of Bentham's influence in British politics has been a matter of some debate. While he attacked both Tory and Whig policies, both the Reform Bill of 1832 (promoted by Bentham's disciple, Lord Henry Brougham) and later reforms in the century (such as the secret ballot, advocated by Bentham's friend, George Grote, who was elected to parliament in 1832) reflected Benthamite concerns. The impact of Bentham's ideas goes further still. Contemporary philosophical and economic vocabulary (for example, "international," "maximize," "minimize," and "codification") is indebted to Bentham's proclivity for inventing terms, and among his other disciples were James Mill and his son, John (who was responsible for an early edition of some of Bentham's manuscripts), as well as the legal theorist, John Austin.

At his death in London, on June 6, 1832, Bentham left literally tens of thousands of manuscript pages—some of which was work only sketched out, but all of which he hoped would be prepared for publication. He also left a large estate, which was used to finance the newly-established University College, London (for those individuals excluded from university education—that is, non-conformists, Catholics and Jews), and his cadaver, per his instructions, was dissected, embalmed, dressed, and placed in a chair, and to this day resides in a cabinet in a corridor of the main building of University College. The Bentham Project, set up in the early 1960s at University College, has as its aim the publishing of a definitive, scholarly edition of Bentham's works and correspondence.

2. Method

Influenced by the philosophes of the Enlightenment (such as Beccaria, Helvétius, Diderot, D'Alembert, and Voltaire) and also by Locke and Hume, Bentham's work combined an empiricist approach with a rationalism that emphasized conceptual clarity and deductive argument. Locke's influence was primarily as the author of the Enquiry Concerning Human Understanding, and Bentham saw in him a model of one who emphasized the importance of reason over custom and tradition and who insisted on precision in the use of terms. Hume's influence was not so much on Bentham's method as on his account of the underlying principles of psychological associationism and on his articulation of the principle of utility, which was then still often annexed to theological views.

Bentham's analytical and empirical method is especially obvious when one looks at some of his main criticisms of the law and of moral and political discourse in general. His principal target was the presence of "fictions"—in particular, legal fictions. On his view, to consider any part or aspect of a thing in abstraction from that thing is to run the risk of confusion or to cause positive deceit. While, in some cases, such "fictional" terms as "relation," "right," "power," and "possession" were of some use, in many cases their original warrant had been forgotten, so that they survived as the product of either prejudice or inattention. In those cases where the terms could be "cashed out" in terms of the properties of real things, they could continue to be used, but otherwise they were to be abandoned. Still, Bentham hoped to eliminate legal fictions as far as possible from the law, including the legal fiction that there was some original contract that explained why there was any law at all. He thought that, at the very least, clarifications and justifications could be given that avoided the use of such terms.

3. Human Nature

For Bentham, morals and legislation can be described scientifically, but such a description requires an account of human nature. Just as nature is explained through reference to the laws of physics, so human behavior can be explained by reference to the two primary motives of pleasure and pain; this is the theory of psychological hedonism.

There is, Bentham admits, no direct proof of such an analysis of human motivation—though he holds that it is clear that, in acting, all people implicitly refer to it. At the beginning of the Introduction to the Principles of Morals and Legislation, Bentham writes:

Nature has placed mankind under the governance of two sovereign masters, pain and pleasure. It is for them alone to point out what we ought to do, as well as to determine what we shall do. On the one hand the standard of right and wrong, on the other the chain of causes and effects, are fastened to their throne. They govern us in all we do, in all we say, in all we think: every effort we can make to throw off our subjection, will serve but to demonstrate and confirm it. (Ch. 1)

From this we see that, for Bentham, pleasure and pain serve not only as explanations for action, but they also define one's good. It is, in short, on the basis of pleasures and pains, which can exist only in individuals, that Bentham thought one could construct a calculus of value.

Related to this fundamental hedonism is a view of the individual as exhibiting a natural, rational self-interest—a form of psychological egoism. In his "Remarks on Bentham's Philosophy" (1833), Mill cites Bentham's The Book of Fallacies (London: Hunt, 1824, pp. 392-3) that "[i]n every human breast... self-regarding interest is predominant over social interest; each person's own individual interest over the interests of all other persons taken together." Fundamental to the nature and activity of individuals, then, is their own well-being, and reason—as a natural capability of the person—is considered to be subservient to this end.

Bentham believed that the nature of the human person can be adequately described without mention of social relationships. To begin with, the idea of "relation" is but a "fictitious entity," though necessary for "convenience of discourse." And, more specifically, he remarks that "the community is a fictitious body," and it is but "the sum of the interests of the several members who compose it." Thus, the extension of the term "individual" is, in the main, no greater and no less than the biological entity. Bentham's view, then, is that the individual—the basic unit of the social sphere—is an "atom" and there is no "self" or "individual" greater than the human individual. A person's relations with others—even if important—are not essential and describe nothing that is, strictly speaking, necessary to its being what it is.

Finally, the picture of the human person presented by Bentham is based on a psychological associationism indebted to David Hartley and Hume; Bentham's analysis of "habit" (which is essential to his understanding of society and especially political society) particularly reflects associationist presuppositions. On this view, pleasure and pain are objective states and can be measured in terms of their intensity, duration, certainty, proximity, fecundity and purity. This allows both for an objective determination of an activity or state and for a comparison with others.

Bentham's understanding of human nature reveals, in short, a psychological, ontological, and also moral individualism where, to extend the critique of utilitarianism made by Graeme Duncan and John Gray (1979), "the individual human being is conceived as the source of values and as himself the supreme value."

4. Moral Philosophy

As Elie Halévy (1904) notes, there are three principal characteristics of which constitute the basis of Bentham's moral and political philosophy: (i) the greatest happiness principle, (ii) universal egoism and (iii) the artificial identification of one's interests with those of others. Though these characteristics are present throughout his work, they are particularly evident in the Introduction to the Principles of Morals and Legislation, where Bentham is concerned with articulating rational principles that would provide a basis and guide for legal, social and moral reform.

To begin with, Bentham's moral philosophy reflects what he calls at different times "the greatest happiness principle" or "the principle of utility"—a term which he borrows from Hume. In adverting to this principle, however, he was not referring to just the usefulness of things or actions, but to the extent to which these things or actions promote the general happiness. Specifically, then, what is morally obligatory is that which produces the greatest amount of happiness for the greatest number of people, happiness being determined by reference to the presence of pleasure and the absence of pain. Thus, Bentham writes, "By the principle of utility is meant that principle which approves or disapproves of every action whatsoever, according to the tendency which it appears to have to augment or diminish the happiness of the party whose interest is in question: or, what is the same thing in other words, to promote or to oppose that happiness." And Bentham emphasizes that this applies to "every action whatsoever" (Ch. 1). That which does not maximize the greatest happiness (such as an act of pure ascetic sacrifice) is, therefore, morally wrong. (Unlike some of the previous attempts at articulating a universal hedonism, Bentham's approach is thoroughly naturalistic.)

Bentham's moral philosophy, then, clearly reflects his psychological view that the primary motivators in human beings are pleasure and pain. Bentham admits that his version of the principle of utility is something that does not admit of direct proof, but he notes that this is not a problem as some explanatory principles do not admit of any such proof and all explanation must start somewhere. But this, by itself, does not explain why another's happiness—or the general happiness—should count. And, in fact, he provides a number of suggestions that could serve as answers to the question of why we should be concerned with the happiness of others.

First, Bentham says, the principle of utility is something to which individuals, in acting, refer either explicitly or implicitly, and this is something that can be ascertained and confirmed by simple observation. Indeed, Bentham held that all existing systems of morality can be "reduced to the principles of sympathy and antipathy," which is precisely that which defines utility. A second argument found in Bentham is that, if pleasure is the good, then it is good irrespective of whose pleasure it is. Thus, a moral injunction to pursue or maximize pleasure has force independently of the specific interests of the person acting. Bentham also suggests that individuals would reasonably seek the general happiness simply because the interests of others are inextricably bound up with their own, though he recognized that this is something that is easy for individuals to ignore. Nevertheless, Bentham envisages a solution to this as well. Specifically, he proposes that making this identification of interests obvious and, when necessary, bringing diverse interests together would be the responsibility of the legislator.

Finally, Bentham held that there are advantages to a moral philosophy based on a principle of utility. To begin with, the principle of utility is clear (compared to other moral principles), allows for objective and disinterested public discussion, and enables decisions to be made where there seem to be conflicts of (prima facie) legitimate interests. Moreover, in calculating the pleasures and pains involved in carrying out a course of action (the "hedonic calculus"), there is a fundamental commitment to human equality. The principle of utility presupposes that "one man is worth just the same as another man" and so there is a guarantee that in calculating the greatest happiness "each person is to count for one and no one for more than one."

For Bentham, then, there is no inconsistency between the greatest happiness principle and his psychological hedonism and egoism. Thus, he writes that moral philosophy or ethics can be simply described as "the art of directing men's action to the production of the greatest possible quantity of happiness, on the part of those whose interest is in view."

5. Political Philosophy

Bentham was regarded as the central figure of a group of intellectuals called, by Elie Halévy (1904), "the philosophic radicals," of which both Mill and Herbert Spencer can be counted among the "spiritual descendants." While it would be too strong to claim that the ideas of the philosophic radicals reflected a common political theory, it is nevertheless correct to say that they agreed that many of the social problems of late eighteenth and early nineteenth century England were due to an antiquated legal system and to the control of the economy by a hereditary landed gentry opposed to modern capitalist institutions. As discussed in the preceding section, for Bentham, the principles that govern morals also govern politics and law, and political reform requires a clear understanding of human nature. While he develops a number of principles already present in Anglo-Saxon political philosophy, he breaks with that tradition in significant ways.

In his earliest work, A Fragment on Government (1776), which is an excerpt from a longer work published only in 1928 as Comment on Blackstone's Commentaries, Bentham attacked the legal theory of Sir William Blackstone. Bentham's target was, primarily, Blackstone's defense of tradition in law. Bentham advocated the rational revision of the legal system, a restructuring of the process of determining responsibility and of punishment, and a more extensive freedom of contract. This, he believed, would favor not only the development of the community, but the personal development of the individual.

Bentham's attack on Blackstone targeted more than the latter's use of tradition however. Against Blackstone and a number of earlier thinkers (including Locke), Bentham repudiated many of the concepts underlying their political philosophies, such as natural right, state of nature, and social contract. Bentham then attempted to outline positive alternatives to the preceding "traditionalisms." Not only did he work to reform and restructure existing institutions, but he promoted broader suffrage and self (that is, representative) government.

a. Law, Liberty and Government

The notion of liberty present in Bentham's account is what is now generally referred to as "negative" liberty—freedom from external restraint or compulsion. Bentham says that "[l]iberty is the absence of restraint" and so, to the extent that one is not hindered by others, one has liberty and is "free." Bentham denies that liberty is "natural" (in the sense of existing "prior to" social life and thereby imposing limits on the state) or that there is an a priori sphere of liberty in which the individual is sovereign. In fact, Bentham holds that people have always lived in society, and so there can be no state of nature (though he does distinguish between political society and "natural society") and no "social contract" (a notion which he held was not only unhistorical but pernicious). Nevertheless, he does note that there is an important distinction between one's public and private life that has morally significant consequences, and he holds that liberty is a good—that, even though it is not something that is a fundamental value, it reflects the greatest happiness principle.

Correlative with this account of liberty, Bentham (as Thomas Hobbes before him) viewed law as "negative." Given that pleasure and pain are fundamental to—indeed, provide—the standard of value for Bentham, liberty is a good (because it is "pleasant") and the restriction of liberty is an evil (because it is "painful"). Law, which is by its very nature a restriction of liberty and painful to those whose freedom is restricted, is a prima facie evil. It is only so far as control by the state is limited that the individual is free. Law is, Bentham recognized, necessary to social order and good laws are clearly essential to good government. Indeed, perhaps more than Locke, Bentham saw the positive role to be played by law and government, particularly in achieving community well-being. To the extent that law advances and protects one's economic and personal goods and that what government exists is self-government, law reflects the interests of the individual.

Unlike many earlier thinkers, Bentham held that law is not rooted in a "natural law" but is simply a command expressing the will of the sovereign. (This account of law, later developed by Austin, is characteristic of legal positivism.) Thus, a law that commands morally questionable or morally evil actions, or that is not based on consent, is still law.

b. Rights

Bentham's views on rights are, perhaps, best known through the attacks on the concept of "natural rights" that appear throughout his work. These criticisms are especially developed in his Anarchical Fallacies (a polemical attack on the declarations of rights issued in France during the French Revolution), written between 1791 and 1795 but not published until 1816, in French. Bentham's criticisms here are rooted in his understanding of the nature of law. Rights are created by the law, and law is simply a command of the sovereign. The existence of law and rights, therefore, requires government. Rights are also usually (though not necessarily) correlative with duties determined by the law and, as in Hobbes, are either those which the law explicitly gives us or those within a legal system where the law is silent. The view that there could be rights not based on sovereign command and which pre-exist the establishment of government is rejected.

According to Bentham, then, the term "natural right" is a "perversion of language." It is "ambiguous," "sentimental" and "figurative" and it has anarchical consequences. At best, such a "right" may tell us what we ought to do; it cannot serve as a legal restriction on what we can or cannot do. The term "natural right" is ambiguous, Bentham says, because it suggests that there are general rights—that is, rights over no specific object—so that one would have a claim on whatever one chooses. The effect of exercising such a universal, natural "right" would be to extinguish the right altogether, since "what is every man's right is no man's right." No legal system could function with such a broad conception of rights. Thus, there cannot be any general rights in the sense suggested by the French declarations.

Moreover, the notion of natural rights is figurative. Properly speaking, there are no rights anterior to government. The assumption of the existence of such rights, Bentham says, seems to be derived from the theory of the social contract. Here, individuals form a society and choose a government through the alienation of certain of their rights. But such a doctrine is not only unhistorical, according to Bentham, it does not even serve as a useful fiction to explain the origin of political authority. Governments arise by habit or by force, and for contracts (and, specifically, some original contract) to bind, there must already be a government in place to enforce them.

Finally, the idea of a natural right is "anarchical." Such a right, Bentham claims, entails a freedom from all restraint and, in particular, from all legal restraint. Since a natural right would be anterior to law, it could not be limited by law, and (since human beings are motivated by self-interest) if everyone had such freedom, the result would be pure anarchy. To have a right in any meaningful sense entails that others cannot legitimately interfere with one's rights, and this implies that rights must be capable of enforcement. Such restriction, as noted earlier, is the province of the law.

Bentham concludes, therefore, that the term "natural rights" is "simple nonsense: natural and imprescriptible rights, rhetorical nonsense,—nonsense upon stilts." Rights—what Bentham calls "real" rights—are fundamentally legal rights. All rights must be legal and specific (that is, having both a specific object and subject). They ought to be made because of their conduciveness to "the general mass of felicity," and correlatively, when their abolition would be to the advantage of society, rights ought to be abolished. So far as rights exist in law, they are protected; outside of law, they are at best "reasons for wishing there were such things as rights." While Bentham's essays against natural rights are largely polemical, many of his objections continue to be influential in contemporary political philosophy.

Nevertheless, Bentham did not dismiss talk of rights altogether. There are some services that are essential to the happiness of human beings and that cannot be left to others to fulfill as they see fit, and so these individuals must be compelled, on pain of punishment, to fulfill them. They must, in other words, respect the rights of others. Thus, although Bentham was generally suspicious of the concept of rights, he does allow that the term is useful, and in such work as A General View of a Complete Code of Laws, he enumerates a large number of rights. While the meaning he assigns to these rights is largely stipulative rather than descriptive, they clearly reflect principles defended throughout his work.

There has been some debate over the extent to which the rights that Bentham defends are based on or reducible to duties or obligations, whether he can consistently maintain that such duties or obligations are based on the principle of utility, and whether the existence of what Bentham calls "permissive rights"—rights one has where the law is silent—is consistent with his general utilitarian view. This latter point has been discussed at length by H.L.A. Hart (1973) and David Lyons (1969).

6. References and Further Reading

a. Bentham's Works

The standard edition of Bentham's writings is The Works of Jeremy Bentham, (ed. John Bowring), London, 1838-1843; Reprinted New York, 1962. The contents are as follows:

  • Volume 1: Introduction; An Introduction to the Principles of Morals and Legislation; Essay on the Promulgation of Laws, Essay on the Influence of Time and Place in Matters of Legislation, A Table of the Springs of Action, A Fragment on Government: or A Comment on the Commentaries; Principles of the Civil Code; Principles of Penal Law
  • Volume 2: Principles of Judicial Procedure, with the outlines of a Procedural Code; The Rationale of Reward; Leading Principles of a Constitutional Code, for any state; On the Liberty of the Press, and public discussion; The Book of Fallacies, from unfinished papers; Anarchical Fallacies; Principles of International Law; A Protest Against Law Taxes; Supply without Burden; Tax with Monopoly
  • Volume 3: Defence of Usury; A Manual of Political Economy; Observations on the Restrictive and Prohibitory Commercial System; A Plan for saving all trouble and expense in the transfer of stock; A General View of a Complete Code of Laws; Pannomial Fragments; Nomography, or the art of inditing laws; Equal Dispatch Court Bill; Plan of Parliamentary Reform, in the form of a catechism; Radical Reform Bill; Radicalism Not Dangerous
  • Volume 4: A View of the Hard Labour Bill; Panopticon, or, the inspection house; Panopticon versus New South Wales; A Plea for the Constitution; Draught of a Code for the Organisation of Judicial Establishment in France; Bentham's Draught for the Organisation of Judicial Establishments, compared with that of a national assembly; Emancipate Your Colonies; Jeremy Bentham to his Fellow Citizens of France, on houses of peers and Senates; Papers Relative to Codification and Public Instruction; Codification Proposal
  • Volume 5: Scotch Reform; Summary View of the Plan of a Judiciary, under the name of the court of lord's delegates; The Elements of the Art of Packing; "Swear Not At All"; Truth versus Ashhurst; The King against Edmonds and Others; The King against Sir Charles Wolseley and Joseph Harrison; Optical Aptitude Maximized, Expense Minimized; A Commentary on Mr Humphreys' Real Property Code; Outline of a Plan of a General Register of Real Property; Justice and Codification Petitions; Lord Brougham Displayed
  • Volume 6: An Introductory View of the Rationale of Evidence; Rationale of Judicial Evidence, specially applied to English Practice, Books I-IV
  • Volume 7: Rationale of Judicial Evidence, specially applied to English Practice, Books V-X
  • Volume 8: Chrestomathia; A Fragment on Ontology; Essay on Logic; Essay on Language; Fragments on Universal Grammar; Tracts on Poor Laws and Pauper Management; Observations on the Poor Bill; Three Tracts Relative to Spanish and Portuguese Affairs; Letters to Count Toreno, on the proposed penal code; Securities against Misrule
  • Volume 9: The Constitutional Code
  • Volume 10: Memoirs of Bentham, Chapters I-XXII
  • Volume 11: Memoirs of Bentham, Chapters XXIII-XXVI; Analytical Index

A new edition of Bentham's Works is being prepared by The Bentham Project at University College, University of London. This edition includes:

  • The Correspondence of Jeremy Bentham, Ed. Timothy L. S. Sprigge, 10 vols., London : Athlone Press, 1968-1984. [Vol. 3 edited by I.R. Christie; Vol. 4-5 edited by Alexander Taylor Milne; Vol. 6-7 edited by J.R. Dinwiddy; Vol. 8 edited by Stephen Conway].
  • An Introduction to the Principles of Morals and Legislation, Ed. J.H. Burns and H.L.A. Hart, London: The Athlone Press, 1970.
  • Of Laws in General. London: Athlone Press, 1970.
  • A Comment on the Commentaries and a Fragment on Government, Ed. J.H. Burns and H.L.A. Hart, London: The Athlone Press, 1977.
  • Chrestomathia, Ed. M. J. Smith, and W. H. Burston, Oxford/New York : Clarendon Press ; Oxford University Press, 1983.
  • Deontology ; together with A Table of the Springs of Action ; and the Article on Utilitarianism. Ed. Amnon Goldworth, Oxford/New York : Clarendon Press ; Oxford University Press, 1983.
  • Constitutional Code : vol. I . Ed. F. Rosen and J. H. Burns, Oxford/New York : Clarendon Press; Oxford University Press, 1983.
  • Securities Against Misrule and Other Constitutional Writings for Tripoli and Greece. Ed. Philip Schofield, Oxford/New York : Clarendon Press ; Oxford University Press, 1990.
  • Official Aptitude Maximized : Expense Minimized. Ed. Philip Schofield, Oxford : Clarendon Press, 1993.
  • Colonies, Commerce, and Constitutional Law : Rid Yourselves of Ultramaria and Other Writings on Spain and Spanish America. Ed. Philip Schofield, Oxford/New York : Clarendon Press ; Oxford University Press, 1995.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Duncan, Graeme & Gray, John. "The Left Against Mill," in New Essays on John Stuart Mill and Utilitarianism, Eds. Wesley E. Cooper, Kai Nielsen and Steven C. Patten, 1979.
  • Halévy, Elie. La formation du radicalisme philosophique, 3 vols. Paris, 1904 [The Growth of Philosophic Radicalism. Tr. Mary Morris. London: Faber & Faber, 1928.]
  • Harrison, Ross. Bentham. London: Routledge and Kegan Paul, 1983.
  • Hart, H.L.A. "Bentham on Legal Rights," in Oxford Essays in Jurisprudence (second series), ed. A.W.B. Simpson (Oxford: The Clarendon Press, 1973), pp. 171-201.
  • Lyons, David. "Rights, Claimants and Beneficiaries," in American Philosophical Quarterly, Vol. 6 (1969), pp. 173-185.
  • MacCunn, John. Six Radical Thinkers, second impression, London, 1910.
  • Mack, Mary Peter. Jeremy Bentham: An Odyssey of Ideas 1748-1792. London: Heinemann, 1962.
  • Manning, D.J. The Mind of Jeremy Bentham, London: Longmans, 1968.
  • Plamenatz, John. The English Utilitarians. Oxford, 1949.
  • Stephen, Leslie. The English Utilitarians. 3 vols., London: Duckworth, 1900.

Author Information

William Sweet
St. Francis Xavier University

Alexandre Kojève (1902—1968)

Alexandre Kojève was responsible for the serious introduction of Hegel into 20th Century French philosophy, influencing many leading French intellectuals who attended his seminar on The Phenomenology of Spirit in Paris in the 30s. He focused on Hegel’s philosophy of history and is best known for his theory of ‘the end of history’ and for initiating ‘existential Marxism.’ Kojève arrives at what is generally considered a truly original interpretation by reading Hegel through the twin lenses of Marx’s materialism and Heidegger’s temporalised ontology.

For Hegel, human history is the history of ‘thought’ as it attempts to understand itself and its relation to the world. He postulates that history began with unity, but into which man, a questioning ‘I’, emerges introducing dualism and splits. Man attempts to heal these sequences of ‘alienations’ dialectically, and drives history forwards, but in so doing causes new divisions which must then be overcome. Hegel sees the possibility of ‘historical reconciliation’ lying in the rational realization of underlying unity – the manifestation of an absolute spirit or ‘geist’ – leading to humanity living according to a unified, shared morality: the end of history.

Kojève takes these ideas of universal historical process and the reconciliation towards unity, and synthesizes them with theories of Marx and Heidegger. He takes Marx’s productivist philosophy that places the transformative activity of a desiring being centre-stage in the historical process, housing it within the conditions of material pursuit and ideological struggle. Drawing on Heidegger, he also defines this being as free, ‘negative’ and radically temporal, thereby recognizing and ‘reclaiming’ its mortality, ridding it of determinism and metaphysical illusion, allowing it to produce its own reality through experience alone.

This article examines the Hegelian context of Kojève’s work, and analyses how Marx and Heidegger contribute to his theory. It also outlines Kojeve’s vision of the culmination of history; how this fits into 20th Century politics; and the profound influence he had on French intellectuals including Sartre, Lacan and Breton, and on America intellectuals including Leo Strauss, Alan Bloom and Francis Fukuyama.

Table of Contents

  1. Chronology of Life and Works
  2. The Hegelian Context
  3. The Influence of Marx
  4. The Influence of Heidegger
  5. The End of History and the Last Man
  6. Kojève's Influence
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Chronology of Life and Works

French philosopher (1902-1968), born Aleksandr Vladimirovich Kozhevnikov in Russia. Kojève studied in Heidelberg, Germany where, under the supervision of Karl Jaspers, he completed a thesis (Die religöse Philosophie Wladimir Solowjews, 1931) on Vladimir Solovyov, a Russian religious philosopher deeply influenced by Hegel. He later settled in Paris, where he taught at the Ecole Pratique des Hautes Ētudes. Taking over from Alexandre Koyré, he taught a seminar on Hegel from 1933 till 1939. Along with Jean Hyppolite, he was responsible for the serious introduction of Hegel into French thought. His lectures exerted a profound influence (both direct and indirect) over many leading French philosophers and intellectuals - amongst them Sartre, Merleau-Ponty, Lacan, Bataille, Althusser, Queneau, Aron, and Breton. Via his friend Leo Strauss, Kojève's thought also exerted influence in America, most especially over Allan Bloom and, later, Francis Fukuyama. His lectures on Hegel were published in 1947 under the title Introduction à la lecture de Hegel, appearing in English as Introduction to the Reading of Hegel (1969). After the Second World War Kojève worked in the French Ministry of Economic Affairs, until his death in 1968. Here he exercised a profound, mandarin influence over French policy, including a role as one of the leading architects of the EEC and GATT. He continued to write philosophy over these years, including works on the pre-Socratics, Kant, the concept of right, the temporal dimensions of philosophical wisdom, the relationship between Christianity and both Western science and communism, and the development of capitalism. Many of these works were only published posthumously.

2. The Hegelian Context

Hegel's philosophy of history, most especially the historicist philosophy of consciousness developed in the Phenomenology of Spirit, provides the core of Kojève's own work. However, Kojève’s Hegel lectures are not so much an exegesis of Hegel's thought, as a profoundly original reinterpretation. By reading Hegel's philosophy of consciousness through the twin lenses of Marx's materialism and Heidegger’s temporalised ontology of human being (Dasein), Kojève can rightly be said to have initiated 'existential Marxism'. Here I will briefly sketch the most salient dimensions of Hegel's philosophy of history, before proceeding to outline Kojève's own interpretation of it.

Perhaps the core of Hegel's philosophy is the idea that human history is the history of thought as it attempts to understand itself and its relation to its world. History is the history of reason, as it grapples with its own nature and its relation to that with which it is confronted (other beings, nature, the eternal). The historical movement of this reason is one of a sequence of alienations (Entfremdungen) or splits, and the subsequent attempt to reconcile these divisions through a restoration of unity. Thus, for example, Hegel sees the world of the Athenian Greeks as one in which people lived in a harmonious relation to their community and the world about, the basis of this harmony being provided by a pre-reflective commitment to shared customs, conventions and habits of thought and action. With the beginnings of Socratic philosophy, however, division and separation is introduced into thought - customary answers to questions of truth, morality, and reality are brought under suspicion. A questioning 'I' emerges, one that experiences itself as distinct and apart from other beings, from customary rules, and from a natural world that becomes an 'object' for it. This introduces into experience a set of 'dualisms' - between subject and object, man and nature, desire and duty, the human and the divine, the individual and the collectivity. For Hegel, the historical movement of thought is a 'dialectical' process wherein these divisions are put through processes of reconciliation, producing in turn new divisions, which thought in turn attempts to reconcile. Historically, this task of reconciliation has been embodied in many forms - in art, in religion, and in philosophy. Enlightenment philosophy, the philosophy of Hegel's own time, is the latest and most sophisticated attempt to reconcile these divisions through reason alone, to freely find man's place amongst others and the universe as a whole. This, for Hegel, is only to be achieved through the overcoming (Aufhebung) of false divisions, by grasping that underlying apparent schisms (such as that between subject and object) there is a unity, with all elements being manifestations of an Absolute Spirit (Geist). Thus Hegel sees the key to historical reconciliation lying in the rational realisation of underlying unity, a unity that can, in time, come to connect individuals with each other and with the world in which they live. Universal history is the product of reason, leading (potentially) to a reconciled humanity, at one with itself, living according to a shared morality that is the outcome of rational reflection.

3. The Influence of Marx

Hegel's philosophy of universal history furnishes that basic framework of Kojève's philosophical stance. History is a processual movement in which division is subjected to reconciliation, culminating in 'the end of history', its completion in a universal society of mutual recognition and affirmation.

However, Kojève reworks Hegel in number of crucial (and, amongst Hegel scholars, controversial) ways. The first of these may be identified with the influence of Marx, especially the writings of the so-called '1848 manuscripts'. Kojève follows Marx's 'inverted Hegelianism’ by understanding the labor of historical development in broadly 'materialist' terms. The making of history is no longer simply a case of reason at work in the world, but of man's activity as a being who collectively produces his own being. This occurs through the labor of appropriating and transforming his material world in order to satisfy his own needs. Whereas Hegel's idealism gives priority to the forms of consciousness that produce the world as experienced, Kojève follows Marx in tying consciousness to the labor of material production and the satisfaction of human desires thereby. While Hegel recuperates human consciousness into a theological totality (Geist or 'Absolute Spirit'), Kojève secularises human history, seeing it as solely the product of man's self-production. Whereas Hegelian reconciliation is ultimately the reconciliation of man with God (totality or the Absolute), for Kojève the division of man from himself is transcended in humanist terms. If Hegel sees the end of history as the final moment of reconciliation with God or Spirit, Kojève (Like Feurbach and Marx) sees it as the transcendence of an illusion, in which God (man's alienated essence, Wesen) is reclaimed by man. Whereas the Hegelian totality provides a prior set of ontological relations between man and world waiting to be apprehended by a maturing consciousness, Kojève sees human action as the transformative process that produces those ontological relations. While Hegel arguably presents a 'panlogistic' relation between man and nature, unifying the two in the Absolute, Kojève sees a fundamental disjunction between the two domains, providing the conditions for human self-production through man's negating and transforming activities.

Perhaps the conceptual key to Kojève's understanding of universal history is desire. Desire functions as the engine of history - it is man's pursuit in realisation of his desires that drives the struggles between men. Desire is the permanent and universal feature of human existence, and when transformed into action it is the basis of all historical agency. The desire for 'recognition' (Anerkennung), the validation of human worth and the satisfaction of needs, propels the struggles and processes that make for historical progression. History moves through a series of determinate configurations, culminating in the end of history, a state in which a common and universal humanity is finally realised. This would entail 'the formation of a which the strictly particular, personal, individual value of each is recognised as such'. Hence individual values and needs would converge upon a common settlement in which a shared human nature (comprising the desires and inclinations that define humanity as such) would find its satisfaction.

How and why is this realisation of mutuality and equality to come about? Kojève follows Hegel's famous presentation of the 'master-slave’ dialectic in order to deduce the necessary overcoming of inequality, division and subordination. The relation of 'master' and ‘slave’ is one in which the satisfaction of a dominant group's or class’ needs (the 'masters’) is met through the subordination of others (the 'slaves' or ‘bondsmen’). The ‘slave’ exists only to affirm the superiority and humanity of the 'master', and to furnish the 'master's’ needs by surrendering up his labor. However, this relation is doomed to failure, for two fundamental reasons. Firstly, the 'master' desires the recognition and affirmation of his full humanity and value, and uses the subordinated 'slave' for that end. This means that the 'master', perversely, is dependent upon the ‘slave’, thus inverting the relation of domination. Moreover, this forced relation of recognition remains thoroughly incomplete, since the 'slave' is not in a position to grant affirmation freely, but is compelled to do so due to his subordination. Affirmation or recognition that is not freely given counts for nothing. As Kojève puts it:

The relation between Master and not recognition properly so-called...The Master is not the only one to consider himself Master. The Slave, also, considers him as such. Hence, he is recognized in his human reality and dignity. But this recognition is one-sided, for he does not recognize in turn the Slave's human reality and dignity. Hence, he is recognized by someone whom he does not recognize. And this is what is insufficient - what is tragic - in his situation...For he can be satisfied only by recognition from one whom he recognizes as worthy of recognizing him.

This establishes the constitutive need for mutual recognition and formal equality, if recognition of value is to be established. It is only when there is mutuality and recognition of all, that the recognition of any one becomes fully possible.

Secondly, for Kojève (as for Marx) it is the laboring 'slave' who is the key to historical progress. It is the ‘slave’ who works, and consequently it is he and not the 'master' who exercises his ‘negativity’ in transforming the world in line with human wants and desires. So, on the material level, the slave possesses the key to his own liberation, namely his active mastery of nature. Moreover, the 'master' has no desire to transform the world, whereas the 'slave', unsatisfied with his condition, imagines and attempts to realise a world of freedom in which his value will finally be recognised and his own desires satisfied. The slave's ideological struggle is to overcome his own fear of death and take-up struggle against the 'master', demanding the recognition of his value and freedom. The coincidence of material and ideological conditions of liberation were already made manifest, for Kojève, by the revolutions of the 18th, 19th and 20th centuries; these struggles set the conditions for the completion of history in the form of universal society.

4. The Influence of Heidegger

If Marx furnishes one central resource for Kojève's rereading of Hegel, Heidegger provides the other. From Heidegger, Kojève takes the insight that humankind is distinguished from nature through its distinctive ontological self-relation. Man's being is conditioned by its radically temporal character, its understanding of its being in time, with finitude or death as its ultimate horizon. Kojève's ontology is, pace Heidegger’s analysis of Dasein in Being & Time, first and foremost experiential and existential. By bringing together Hegel with Heidegger, Kojève attempts to radically historicise existentialism, while simultaneously giving Hegelian historicity a radically existential twist, wherein man's existential freedom defines his being. Freedom is understood as the ontological relation of 'negativity', the incompleteness of human being, its constitutive ‘lack’. It is precisely because of this lack of a fully constituted being that man experiences (or, more properly is nothing other than) desire. The negativity of being, manifest as desire, makes possible man's self-making, the process of 'becoming'. This position can be see to draw inspiration from Heidegger's critique of the transcendental preoccupations of Western thought, which he claims set reified, metaphysically assured figurations of Being over and above the processes of Becoming (wherein the 'Being of Beings', das Sein des Seieinden, is variously revealed within the horizon of temporality). The disavowal of such metaphysically anchored and ultimately timeless configurations of human being frees man from determinism and 'throws' him into his existential freedom. In Kojève's thinking, man’s struggle is to exercise this freedom in order to produce a world in which his desires are satisfied, in the course of which he comes to accept his own freedom, ridding himself of the illusions of religion and superstition, 'heroically' claiming his own finitude or mortality.

We can see, then, how Kojève attempts to synthesise Hegel, Marx and Heidegger. From Hegel he takes the notion of a universal historical process within which reconciliation unfolds through an intersubjective dialectic, resulting in unity. From Marx he takes a secularised, de-theologised, and productivist philosophical anthropology, one that places the transformative activity of a desiring being centre stage in the historical process. From Heidegger, he takes the existentialist interpretation of human being as free, negative, and radically temporal. Pulling three together, he presents a vision of human history in which man grasps his freedom to produce himself and his world in pursuit of his desires, and in doing so drives history toward its end (understood both as culmination or exhaustion, and its goal or completion).

5. The End of History and the Last Man

Kojève's vision of the culmination of history has, in recent years, exercised a renewed influence, not least in light of the collapse of Soviet communism and its satellite states. If we examine the vision of completion that Kojève held-out, we can see precisely why the advocates (or apologists) of a post-Cold War global capitalist order have drawn such inspiration from Kojève's thesis.

For Kojève, historical reconciliation will culminate in the equal recognition of all individuals. This recognition will remove the rationale for war and struggle, and so will usher-in peace. In this way, history, politically speaking, culminates in a universal (global) order which is without classes or distinctions - in Hegelian terms, there are no longer any 'masters' and ‘slaves’, only free human beings who mutually recognise and affirm each others' freedom. This political moment takes the form of law, which confers universal recognition upon all individuals, thereby satisfying the particular individual's desire to be affirmed as an equal amongst others.

Simultaneously, the progression of man's productive capacities, his ability to take nature and transform it in order to satisfy his own needs and desires, will result in prosperity and freedom from such want. For Kojève, the economic culmination of human productive capacities finds its apotheosis not in communism, but in capitalism. Like Marx, Kojève believed that capitalism had unleashed productive forces, generating heretofore unimagined wealth. Moreover, like Marx he believed that the expansion of capitalism was an homogenising force, producing a globalising cultural standard that laid waste to local attachments, traditions and boundaries, replacing them with bourgeoisie values. Kojève departs from Marxism (and its variants such as Leninism) by rejecting the notion that capitalism contained inherent contradictions that would inevitably bring about its demise and supercession by communism. Marx thought that the immiseration of workers under 19th century capitalism would worsen as the pressure of market competition would lead to ever-more brutal extraction of surplus from workers' labor, in attempt to offset the falling rate of profit. This would result in the pauperisation of the proletariat, and capitalism's inability to avoid such crisis would necessitate the overthrow of its relations by a proletariat raised up to class consciousness under the conditions of its immiseration. Kojève, in contrast, believed that 20th century capitalism had found a way out of these contradictions, finding ways to yoke the market system to a redistributive arrangement that managed to spread the wealth it produced. Far from becoming increasingly impoverished, the working class was coming to enjoy unprecedented prosperity. This is why Kojève, as early as 1948, was proclaiming the United States as the economic model for the 'post-historical' world, the most efficient and successful in conquering nature in order to provide for human material needs. Hence he asserted, long before the final collapse of the Soviet empire, that the Cold War would end in the triumph of the capitalist West, achieved through economic rather than military means.

The end of history would also usher-in other distinctive forms. Philosophically, it would end in absolute knowledge displacing ideology. Artistically, the reconciled consciousness would express itself through abstract art - while pictorial and representational art captured cultural specifics, these specifics would have been effaced, leaving abstract aesthetic forms as the embodiment of universal and homogeneous consciousness.

However, Kojève's disposition to the culmination of universal history is radically ambivalent. On the one hand, he follows Marx by seeing in idyllic terms the post-historical world, one of universal freedom, emancipation from war and want, leaving space for "art, love, play, and so forth; in short, everything that makes Man happy". However, Kojève is simultaneously beset by pessimism. In his philosophical anthropology, man is defined by his negating activity, by his struggle to overcome himself and nature through struggle and contestation. This is the ontological definition of man, his raison d'etre. Yet the end of history marks the end of this struggle, thereby exhausting man of the activity which has defined his essence. The end of history ushers-in the 'death of man'; paradoxically, man is robbed of the definitional core of his existence precisely at the moment of his triumph. Post-historical man will no longer be 'man' as we understand him, but will be 'reanimalized', such that the end of history marks the ‘definitive annihilation of Man properly so-called'.

6. Kojève's Influence

The influence of Kojève's thought has been profound, both within France and beyond. It is possible to trace many connections within French philosophy that owe varying degrees of debt to Kojève, given that his distinctive reinterpretation of Hegel was key for the French reception of Hegel's thought. However, there are also a number of important philosophers for whom Kojève's Hegelianism provided direct insights that were taken-up and in-turn used to found distinctive philosophical positions.

Firstly, we must note the importance of Kojève's Hegelianism for Sartre's philosophical development. It is a matter of on-going contention whether or not Sartre personally attended the Hegel seminars of the 1930s. However, it can reasonably be claimed that Kojève's existential and Marxian reading of the Phenomenology was equally important as Heidegger's Being & Time for the position presented in Sartre's Being & Nothingness. Central to Sartre’s account is a thoroughly Kojèveian philosophical anthropology, one which finds man's essence in his freedom as pure negative activity, existentially separating the human for-itself (pour-soi) from the natural world of reified Being (en-soi). Sartre's account of the 'master-slave' dialectic follows Kojève’s in its existential reworking, albeit without the optimism that finds a possibility of reconciliation in this intersubjective struggle (for Sartre, the dialectic is doomed to repeat a struggle for domination in which each party attempts to claim its own freedom via the mortification of the other's Being). Moreover, Sartre's subsequent attempts to reconcile historical materialism with existentialism owe more than a passing debt to Kojève's original formulation of an 'existential Marxist' position.

Another eminent thinker for whom Kojève proved decisive was Jacques Lacan. Lacan's account of psycho-social formation was developed through a synthesis of Freud and structuralism, read through Kojève's ontologised version of the 'master-slave' dialectic. For Lacan, following Kojève, human subjectivity is defined first and foremost by desire. It is the experience of lack, the twin of the experience of desire, that provides the ontological condition of subject formation; it is only through the lack-desire dyad that a being comes into the awareness of its own separation from the world in which it is, at first, thoroughly immersed. Moreover, Lacan's account of the childhood development of self-consciousness, captured through his analysis of the 'mirror-stage', replays the intersubjective mediation of consciousness that Kojève presented to his French students (Lacan amongst them) in the Hegel lectures.

Kojève also profoundly influenced the likes of Georges Bataille and Raymond Queneau, both through the lectures they attended, and through the friendships he maintained with them for many years after. Queneau is often associated with Andre Breton and the surrealists (with whom he broke in 1929), but his novels present a vision of the world that is profoundly indebted to Kojève. Many of his most famous books depict life at the end of history; there is no more historical movement, progress or transformation to come, and his characters live in a kind of 'eternal present' attending to the activities of everyday enjoyment. History recurs as something that can only be enjoyed as a tourist attraction, or as a reverie of the past, viewed from the vantage point of its demise. Bataille (anthropologist, philosopher and pornographer, a doyen of recent postmodern aestheticism and anti-rationalism) was perhaps the most powerful articulator of Kojève's pessimism in the face of the 'death of man'. The victory of reason was, for Bataille, a curse; its inevitable triumph in the unstoppable march of modernity brought with it homogeneity, order, and disenchantment. The triumph of reason as history meant the twilight and death of man, as the excessive and destructive power of negativity was displaced by harmonious, reciprocal equilibrium. Bataille's response, a liberatory struggle against these forces through the evocation of perverse desires, madness, and anguish, takes Kojève's prognosis at its word, and stages a heroic resistance against the tide of historical forces.

The influence of Kojève outside France has probably been most pronounced in the United States. His ideas achieved a new salience and exposure with the publication of Francis Fukayama's The End of History and the Last Man (1992), in the wake of the Cold War. Fukayama was a student of Allan Bloom's, who in turn was a 'disciple' of the 'esoteric' émigré political philosopher Leo Strauss. It was Strauss who introduced a generation of his students to Kojève's thought, and in Bloom’s case, arranged for him to study with Kojève in Paris in the 1960s. The book, an international bestseller, presents nothing less than a triumphal vindication of Kojève's supposedly prescient thesis that history has found its end in the global triumph of capitalism and liberal democracy. With the final demise of Soviet Marxism, and the global hegemony of capitalism, we have finally reached the end of history. There are no more battles to be fought, no more experiments in social engineering to be attempted; the world has arrived at a homogenised state in which the combination of capitalism and liberal democracy will reign supreme, and all other cultural and ideological systems will be consigned irretrievably to the past. Fukayama follows Kojève in tying the triumph of capitalism to the satisfaction of material human needs. Moreover, he sees it as the primary mechanism for the provision of recognition and value. Consumerism and the commodity form, for Fukayama, present the means by which recognition is mediated. Humans desire to be valued by others, and the means of appropriating that valuation is the appropriation of the things that others themselves value; hence lifestyle and fashion become the mechanisms of mutual esteem in a post-historical world governed by the logic of capitalist individualism.

7. References and Further Reading

  • Butler, Judith: Subjects of Desire: Hegelian Reflections in Twentieth Century France. New York, Columbia University Press, 1999
  • Descombes, Vincent: Modern French Philosophy. Cambridge, Cambridge University Press, 1980
  • Drury, Shadia B: Alexandre Kojève: The Roots of Postmodern Politics. Basingstoke, Macmillan, 1994
  • Fukuyama, Francis: The End of History and the Last Man. Harmondsworth, Penguin, 1992
  • Hegel, G.W.F: Phenomenology of Spirit. Oxford, Oxford University Press, 1977
  • Heidegger, Martin: Being and Time. Oxford, Blackwell, 1962
  • Kojève, Alexander: Introduction to the Reading of Hegel. New York, Basic Books, 1969
  • Kojève, Alexander: Kant. Paris, Gallimard, 1973
  • Kojève, Alexander: Le Concept, le Temps et le Discours. Paris, Gallimard, 1991
  • Kojève, Alexander: Outline of a Phenomenology of Right. London, Rowman & Littlefield, 2000
  • Lacan, Jacques: Ecrits: A Selection. London, Tavistock, 1977
  • Poster, Mark: Existential Marxism in Postwar France: From Sartre to Althusser. Princeton, Princeton University Press, 1975
  • Roth, Michael S: Knowing and History: Appropriations of Hegel in Twentieth Century France. Ithaca and London, Cornell University Press, 1988
  • Sartre, Jean-Paul: Being and Nothingness: An Essay on Phenomenological Ontology. London, Routledge , 1989

Author Information

Majid Yar
United Kingdom

Jacqueline Pascal (1625—1661)

pascal_jA Cistercian nun, Jacqueline Pascal made a major contribution to philosophy of education through her treatise on the methods and principles of the pedagogy used at the convent school at Port-Royal. In her educational theory, the teacher emerges as a spiritual director who encourages the moral progress of her pupils through ascetical exercises and personal interviews. The right of women to acquire a theological culture and the right of the teaching nun to engage in theological commentary are defended in this model of education. Jacqueline Pascal’s writings also developed a substantial defense of the freedom of conscience, especially when exercised by women. She defended the right of women to pursue their personal vocation, regardless of economic resources and of parental attitude. During the crisis over Jansenism, she defended the right of women to dissent from certain ecclesiastical judgments despite civil and ecclesiastical pressures to assent to them. In her meditations on the divine attributes, Pascal employed a via negativa theology that stresses the unknowability of the hidden godhead. The divine essence transcends the gendered contours of the images of God. Long eclipsed by the philosophical genius of her brother Blaise, Jacqueline Pascal has recently emerged as the artisan of an educational, political, and religious philosophy with its own distinctive concerns.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Works
  3. Philosophical Themes
    1. Philosophy of Education
    2. Vocational Freedom
    3. Freedom of Conscience
    4. Apophatic Theology
  4. Reception and Interpretation
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Biography

Jacqueline Pascal was born on October 5, 1625 in Clermont in the French province of Auvergne. A member of the noblesse de robe, the Pascal family had long distinguished itself by its judicial and political service. A lawyer by training, her father Étienne Pascal served as president of the Cour des Aides, a provincial tax court. Her mother Antoinette Begon Pascal descended from a family of French diplomats and judges. The last of the family’s children, Jacqueline had Gilberte Pascal Périer (1620-1687) and Blaise Pascal (1623-1662) for siblings. With the death of his wife shortly after Jacqueline’s birth, Étienne Pascal began to educate his children at home. An erudite scholar with a pronounced interest in mathematics, the father provided his children with an education stressing mathematics and philosophy as well as instruction in literature and history.

Étienne Pascal moved his family to Paris in 1631. He immediately joined the intellectual circles of the capital, including the circle of Father Mersenne, the patron of Descartes. Delegated to teach her sister Jacqueline to read, Gilberte Pascal discovered her sister’s precocious interest in poetry. By the age of eight, Jacqueline was composing her own verse. At the age of eleven, she wrote and directed an entire five-act play with two other girls of her own age. At the age of twelve, she published a book of poetry. With her growing literary reputation, Jacqueline was invited to the court at Saint-Germain-en-Laye in 1638, where Queen Anne of Austria personally thanked her for a poem she had composed on the queen’s recent pregnancy. Astonishing onlookers with her ability to write spontaneous poems on themes assigned by courtiers, Jacqueline Pascal acquired national fame as an artistic prodigy.

In 1638 the fortunes of the Pascal family grew more somber. Jacqueline fell ill with smallpox. Although she would recover, the scars from the illness remained for life. Étienne fell into political disgrace. During a dispute over the payments owed shareholders in the City Hall of Paris by the crown, a riot of discontented shareholders broke out. A member of the protesting shareholders, but not physically present at the disturbance, Étienne Pascal was placed under arrest by Cardinal Richelieu. Evading arrest, he fled into exile. In 1639 Jacqueline personally intervened with Cardinal Richelieu to obtain the pardon of her father. Charmed by the adolescent who had just performed a play in his presence and had shown such courage in directly addressing the prime minister, Richelieu pardoned Étienne and appointed him the royal superintendant of tax collection in the province of Normandy.

The assignment to Rouen would prove a politically hazardous one. Jealous of its ancient independence from Paris and resentful of the crushing taxes imposed by the crown for the prosecution of Louis XIII’s wars, Normandy was the scene of recurrent riots and assaults on representatives of the crown. To help his father, overwhelmed by the confused tax records of the province, Blaise Pascal invented his celebrated calculating machine, which permitted the user to perform the basic computational exercises of addition, subtraction, multiplication, and division mechanically. Jacqueline the poet flourished during the Rouen years. Encouraged by the dramatist Pierre Corneille, a Rouen native and close family friend, Jacqueline Pascal won the Prix de la Tour, a prestigious Norman literary award for her poem “On the Conception of the Virgin.”

The Normandy years also witnessed a capital religious change in the Pascal family: their conversion to Jansenism. In 1646 Étienne Pascal broke his hip in an accident. Two lay medical doctors, the Deschamps brothers, restored him to health through careful treatment of the broken bones. As they supervised his recovery, they shared the austere version of the Catholic faith which they had learned from the Abbé Saint-Cyran, the chaplain of the Port-Royal convent in Paris. Saint-Cyran promoted the neo-Augustinian theory of grace, predestination, and the elect defended by his friend Jansenius, the deceased Louvain theologian and bishop of Ypres. To this theology of grace Saint-Cyran added his own distinctive moral rigorism and opposition to Jesuit casuistry. Étienne, Blaise, and Jacqueline Pascal were quickly converted to the Jansenist cause. During a home visit in Rouen, the newly married Gilberte Pascal Périer and her husband Florin Périer also joined the controversial movement.

The religious conversion marked an intellectual change in the family. Theology replaced the older focus on science and literature. Through the programmatic spiritual reading pursued by the family members, Jacqueline Pascal acquired a new Augustinian philosophical culture. She studied the works of Saint Augustine himself as well as the writings of later medieval Augustinian writers, notably Saint Bernard of Clairvaux. She read the central works of the burgeoning Jansenist movement: Jansenius’s Reform of the Interior Man, Antoine Arnauld’s Of Frequent Communion, and Saint-Cyran’s Familiar Catechism and Christian and Spiritual Letters. The works of François de Sales and Pierre de Bérulle were also carefully studied.

When they returned to Paris in 1647, Blaise and Jacqueline Pascal regularly attended services at the Port-Royal convent, the center of the Jansenist movement. Jacqueline nursed her sickly brother and served as his amanuensis as he pursued his groundbreaking research on the problem of the vacuum and contested the physics of Descartes. Under the spiritual direction of Port-Royal’s chaplain Antoine Singlin and abbess Angélique Arnauld, Jacqueline decided that she had a vocation to the convent but her father strongly opposed it. As a compromise, Jacqueline agreed to remain with her ailing father in his Paris and Clermont households until his death; in return, her father agreed to permit Jacqueline to live a quasi-monastic life of prayer and asceticism within his home. Following the death of Étienne Pascal on September 24, 1651, Jacqueline prepared to enter the convent, but her vocation was now opposed by her brother Blaise, who had grown dependent on his sister’s nursing and secretarial skills and whose religious fervor had waned. Defying her brother, Jacqueline entered the Port-Royal convent on January 4, 1652. On May 26, 1652, Jacqueline was clothed in the habit of a nun and assumed her new religious name: Soeur Jacqueline de Saint-Euphémie.

During her novitiate years, the lingering animosity between Soeur Jacqueline and Blaise Pascal burst into open conflict during the crisis of the dowry. Breaking with the custom of leaving the bulk of a family’s estate to the eldest son, Étienne Pascal’s will and testament had divided his substantial estate equally among his three children. As a novice and a legal major, Soeur Jacqueline could still dispose of her share of her inheritance as she saw fit, but once she pronounced her final vows as a nun, she was forbidden by canon and civil law from receiving or disposing of wealth. In the French civil law of the period, a professed cloistered nun was dead to the world and had lost civic personhood. When Soeur Jacqueline announced to her siblings that she had decided to give her share of the inheritance to the convent of Port-Royal, Blaise and Gilberte violently objected. They claimed that such a gift went far beyond the familial provision of a dowry that was customary for a nun during this period. The siblings objected that the use of Jacqueline’s portion of the inheritance for the convent would deprive Blaise and the Périer children of income necessary for their research and education. They pointed out that the estate of Étienne Pascal was still under the purview of the courts since questions concerning their father’s debtors and creditors were still unresolved. If Soeur Jacqueline went ahead with her proposed donation to Port-Royal, the siblings threatened legal action against her.

When a stunned Jacqueline Pascal sought the counsel of Mère Angélique, the convent abbess advised her to abandon her claims to the disputed inheritance and pronounce her vows as an undowered nun. One of the reforms introduced by Mère Angélique at Port-Royal had been the abandonment of the traditional dowry requirement and the insistence that admission to the convent should not depend on the economic resources of the candidate. As the subsequent stormy interviews with her brother Blaise in the convent parlor indicated, such wise and liberating counsel was not easily accepted by Soeur Jacqueline since it wounded her family and class pride. Shortly before her profession as a nun, Blaise agreed to provide a donation to the convent that was equivalent to a generous dowry for a cloistered nun at the time, although Jacqueline had renounced her legal rights to the inheritance and the convent had clearly indicated that there was no requirement for such a payment. Soeur Jacqueline de Sainte-Euphémie pronounced her vows on June 5, 1653. During her decade at Port-Royal, Soeur Jacqueline would be entrusted with major offices: headmistress of the convent school, novice mistress, and subprioress.

The convent entered by Jacqueline Pascal was the object of increasing persecution. Since the appointment of Saint-Cyran as its chaplain in 1638, Port-Royal had become the center of the Jansenist movement. With a rural branch (Port-Royal des Champs) and an urban branch (Port-Royal de Paris), the convent disseminated Jansenist ideas to a large lay public. It conducted a school for girls and provided a hostel for women desiring to make retreats. Its large Parisian church featured sermons and conferences directed at educated laity. The messieurs, a group of erudite laymen who occupied buildings adjacent to the convent at Port-Royal des Champs, conducted a school for boys and published influential textbooks, translations, and theological treatises.

Published posthumously in 1640, the Augustinus of Jansenius contained the creed of the movement. The book argued that the salvation of the elect was completely dependant upon God’s grace and that the Jesuits, among others, had dangerously exaggerated the contribution of free will and meritorious works to the act of salvation. At the urging of the French crown, the Vatican had censured the Augustinus in 1642. In 1653 Pope Innocent X condemned five propositions on free will and grace as heretical and linked these propositions to Jansenius and his disciples. In 1656 Pope Alexander VII declared that the church was condemning these propositions precisely in the sense in which Jansenius had defended them. The Sorbonne theological faculty and the French Assembly of the Clergy delivered similar condemnations throughout the 1650s.

The Jansenists had their own powerful defenses. The publication of Blaise Pascal’s Provincial Letters (1655-1656) reduced the opponents of Jansenism to ridicule. The miraculous healing of Soeur Jacqueline’s niece Marguerite Périer, a pupil at Port-Royal, in 1656 was grudgingly declared worthy of belief by the Archdiocese of Paris and trumpeted by the Jansenists as divine vindication of their cause. To defend the Jansenist party from threatened excommunication, Antoine Arnauld, the movement’s leading theologian, devised the ingenious distinction between droit and fait. According to this distinction, Catholics were required to submit to church judgments on matters of droit (the law concerning faith and morals) since right belief and right conduct were essential to salvation. But they could not be compelled to assent to church judgments on matters of fait (empirical facts, such as whether a particular book or author had made a heretical statement), since the church did not enjoy the charism of infallibility on such an empirical matter. A minority of French bishops defended such distinctions as legitimate and traditional in the church.

Despite these defenses, the persecution of Port-Royal and the attendant Jansenist movement intensified once Louis XIV assumed the personal governance of France in 1661. The throne drew up a formulary that affirmed the church’s earlier condemnation of the five heretical propositions, and of Jansenius for having held them. All clergy, members of religious orders, and teachers on French soil were to sign the formulary under oath. The nuns at Port-Royal were singled out for the mandated signature. The crisis of the signature divided the Jansenist community. The convent chaplain Antoine Singlin counseled an unreserved signature as an act of submission to church authority. Antoine Arnauld recommended that the nuns sign but make clear that they were assenting only to the document’s judgments of droit (the condemnation of heretical propositions concerning free will and grace) and that they were maintaining silence on the judgments of fait (that Jansenius had actually endorsed these heretical theories.) The majority of nuns, led by Soeur Jacqueline, were inclined to refuse even a reserved signature to the formulary since they could not in conscience even appear to assent to a condemnation of an author they believed innocent of the accusation of heresy.

As the community debated the question of the signature, the crown moved against the suspect convent. In the spring of 1661, royal emissaries banished the convent’s confessors and spiritual directors, closed the convent school, and expelled the convent’s postulants and novices. In the summer of 1661, the new royal superintendent of the convent, Abbé Louis Bail, conducted an interrogation of the nuns regarding their theological views and devotional practices. Soeur Jacqueline was interrogated in July, with particular emphasis on her views on predestination and free will. In June of 1661, Soeur Jacqueline wrote a letter stating her opposition to any signature of the controversial formulary, but, like the other Port-Royal nuns under duress, she ultimately signed the formulary. In concert with the other nuns, she added a written codicil to her signature that explained the strictly reserved nature of her assent.

On October 4, 1661, Soeur Jacqueline de Sainte-Euphémie died after a brief illness. The physical cause of her death remains unclear, but Jansenist authors quickly acclaimed her as the protomartyr of the persecuted movement. In their eulogies of Soeur Jacqueline, they claimed that the ecclesiastical and political coercion during the crisis of the signature had brought about the untimely death of a conscientious nun.

2. Works

By the time of her death, Jacqueline Pascal had written works in a wide range of genres: poetry, letters, autobiography, biography, spiritual treatise, educational treatise, and judicial memoir.

Her poetry was largely written in the years before her entry into Port-Royal: 1638-1643. It employs a variety of genres: sonnet, epigram, rondeau, idyll, lyric. The early romantic and political poetry of her youth gave way to a more theocentric and meditational poetry later in adolescence.

Written shortly before her entry into the convent, On the Mystery of the Death of Our Lord Jesus Christ (1651) is a spiritual treatise on the Passion of Christ. Using a one-to-one correspondence between an attribute of Christ in the Passion and the moral virtues necessary for the disciple of Christ, Pascal sketches the ideal moral character of the Christian rooted in abandonment of the self to the divine will.

An autobiographical narrative, Report of Soeur Jacqueline de Sainte-Éuphemie to the Mother Prioress of Port-Royal des Champs (1653) recounts the crisis of the dowry. It also constitutes an apology for the right of women to pursue a vocation regardless of economic resources or of parental opposition.

Based on her experience as headmistress of the convent school of Port-Royal, A Rule for Children (1657) is a treatise on education that explains the goals, methods, and principles Soeur Jacqueline used in the school. This pointedly monastic model of education privileges formation in the moral and theological virtues as the principal goal of education.

A memorial of her interrogation by church inquisitors during the crisis of the signature, Interrogation of Soeur Jacqueline de Sainte Euphémie (Pascal) (1661) presents Soeur Jacqueline artfully responding to questions concerning neuralgic issues in the Jansenist controversy: the relationship between grace and free will in the act of salvation, the role of divine predestination in salvation, the nature of the elect.

A biographical sketch, A Memoir of Mère Marie Angélique by Soeur Jacqueline de Sainte Euphémie Pascal (1661) is a moral portrait of the salient virtues of the famed abbess and reformer of Port-Royal. The moral rigorism of the convent is apparent in the sketch’s condemnation of the least trace of worldliness in the Christian.

The correspondence of Jacqueline Pascal, especially her letters to her brother Blaise, contains much material of philosophical interest. Her letters remain our best source of information concerning the religious transformation her brother underwent during the mysterious “night of fire” in November 1654. A letter of 1647 provides a satirical sketch of Descartes, whom she met during a stormy visit to her brother when the two philosophers were locked in a dispute over physics, specifically over the problem of the vacuum. Several letters justify the right of women to pu