Category Archives: History of Philosophy

Guo Xiang (c. 252—312 C.E.)

Guo Xiang (also known as Kuo Hsiang and Zixuan) is the author of the most important commentary on the classic Daoist text Zhuangzi (Chuang-tzu). He is responsible for the current arrangement of thirty-three chapters divided into inner, outer and miscellaneous sections. His commentary represents a substantial philosophical achievement that has been compared to the Zhuangzi itself. Ostensibly the purpose of a commentary should be to elucidate the ideas in the original text. However, Guo's Zhuangzi commentary adds many original ideas. It is possible to delve deeper into their meaning by examining the text on which he is commenting as if it were a commentary on the work of Guo. The fact that Guo chose to present his philosophy this way—within the framework of this Daoist classic—has served as a blueprint for the manner in which Confucians, Daoists and, increasingly from Guo's time, Buddhists have engaged in constructive dialogue, building systems of thought which include the strengths of all three systems.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Work
  2. Central Concepts
    1. Lone/Self-Transformation and the Absence of a Creator
    2. Ziran, Action and Nonaction
    3. Comfort with One’s Role (an qi fen)
    4. The Sage
  3. Guo Xiang’s Influence on Chinese Thought
  4. References and Further Reading

1. Life and Work

Very little is known about the life of Guo Xiang. He lived in a time of great political upheaval and yet his own political career was one of consistent and significant success. He maintained a high position within one of the six rebellious factions that contributed to the rapid demise of the Western Jin Dynasty (265-316 CE). This fact is interesting because unlike such contemporary figures as Ji Kang (223-262 CE) or Ruan Ji (210-263 CE), who both retired from what they saw as a corrupt governmental system, Guo remained to play what he regarded as the proper role of an engaged public dignitary.

Like the other great figure of the xuanxue (mysterious or profound learning) movement, Wang Bi (Wang Pi, 226-249 CE), Guo sought to synthesize the accepted Confucian morality within an ontological system that would encompass the insights expressed in the Zhuangzi and the Daodejing (Tao Te Ching). But while Wang Bi put the greatest emphasis on the unitary nature of reality, particularly in the concept of wu (nothingness), Guo emphasized individuality and interdependence. Guo's position is not as diametrically opposed to Wang's as is often assumed, Guo does not claim there is a dualist or objective reality to the world around us and he does maintain the use of dao as the unitary, nameless and formless basis of reality. This reality is expressed as a process Guo calls "self-transformation" or "lone transformation" (zihua or duha) in which all things are responsible for their own creation and for the set of relationships that exist between themselves and the rest of the world. Our self-transformation was and is at each moment conditioned by all the self-transformations coming before us and we in turn condition all the self-transformations that come after us. By shifting the focus onto those relationships, Guo arrives at a view of the transcendent sage that is radically different and innovative. While the traditional view of a Daoist sage was someone who removed himself from the mundane world, for Guo this notion is false and misleading. The social and political environments in which people relate to each other are no less natural than a forest or mountaintop and to a person who appreciates why she exists in the particular relationship to others in which she does, the proper course of action is not to run away, but to become involved. In other words, we must become engaged with the world around us, but not because of a continuous state of existence that we share with people and things around us, rather, it is because of a continuous act of creation that at its core makes us responsible for the world and its proper maintenance.

Ji Kang and Ruan Ji pursued the ideal of "overcoming orthodox teaching and following nature" (yue mingjiao er ren ziran). "Orthodox teaching" (mingjiao) includes the proper behavior being matched to the proper role, such as for a parent, a child, a ruler or a subject. Different xuanxue figures accepted these ideals to different extents, but nearly all held them in distinction to ziran, naturalness or spontaneity. Guo's concept of ziran contained all governmental and social spheres, so it made no sense to try to set the realms of mingjiao and ziran in opposition to each other. For Guo, the roles required by Confucian propriety are not imposed upon a natural system that would otherwise be in chaos. They are, instead, the natural result of the system of spontaneous self-transformation and chaos is merely what results when one fails to recognize one's proper role. Guo directs much of the Zhuangzi's advice about equalizing apparent contradiction in this direction.

There is some controversy over the true authorship of Guo's commentary to the Zhuangzi. The earliest source, the Jin Shu (Standard History of the Jin Dynasty), accuses Guo of plagiarizing all but two chapters of the commentary from Xiang Xiu (d. 300 CE), writing a generation earlier. Current scholarship, while acknowledging that Guo made use of Xiang Xiu's work and other earlier commentaries, still credits Guo as the principal author. The evidence for this recognition falls into three main areas. Firstly, the most innovative philosophical features in the commentary do not correspond with those in other works by Xiang Xiu. Secondly, in the early twentieth century, a postface to the commentary was discovered which details the work Guo carried out and finally, various linguistic analyses and references in other works suggest that Guo is the principal author.

2. Central Concepts

a. Lone/Self-transformation and the Absence of a Creator

Guo calls the process by which all things come into existence "lone transformation" (duhua) or "self-transformation" (zihua). The claim that all things share equally in creating the world does not deny that differences exist, but it does deny that these differences translate into differences of value. That one person may be less talented or intelligent than another does not affect the worth of that person, but rather helps determine the proper role for him to play

Given the importance of self-transformation in Guo's philosophical system, he wished to deny any organizing principle. Even Wang Bi's emphasis on wu (nothingness) came too close to occupying the place of an original cause. It was necessary for Guo to draw the line clearly, even if it meant contradicting the text on which he was commenting. In a note to a section of the Zhuangzi that leaves open the question of whether there is a creator, Guo writes:

The myriad things have myriad attributes, the adopting and discarding [of their attributes] is different, as if there was a true ruler making them do so. But if we search for evidence or a trace of this ruler, in the end we will not find it. We will then understand that things arise of themselves, and are not caused by something else. (Zhuangzi commentary, chapter 2)

b. Ziran, Action and Nonaction

The natural, spontaneous state of affairs that results from the process of self-transformation is ziran. Ziran is a compound of two different terms zi, meaning "self" and ran, meaning "to be so," and can be translated as "nature," "the self-so," or "things as they are." While many other Daoist thinkers distinguish ziran from the mundane social world in which we live, for Guo they are identical. Even social hierarchy is the natural result of how things come to be as themselves. When we follow our natures, the result is peace and prosperity. When we oppose them, the result is chaos.

Thus, Guo seeks to provide a specific interpretation to the doctrine of nonaction (wuwei). He writes that "taking no action does not mean folding one's arms and closing one's mouth" (Zhuangzi commentary, chapter 11). In chapter 3 of the Zhuangzi, we encounter the story of Cook Ding, who carves an ox, not by using his senses or dexterity, but by equating his idea of who he is with his situation and the task at hand. For Guo, if one has correctly perceived the way in which all things share in the creation of ziran, then correct action in the world will follow naturally.

Therefore, what Guo means by ziran is very different from what Western philosophers refer to as "the state of nature." Ziran is the expression of a naturally peaceful and harmonious system, available to all who can recognize their place.

c. Comfort with One's Role (an qi fen)

One key to the correct appreciation of one's place in the world is Guo's concept of fen, meaning "share" or "role." Guo employs the idea of qi (ch'i), "vital energy" or "vital essence," to explain the manner in which the dao imbues the world with life-giving force. One's natural allotment of qi therefore determines one's fen. The proper functioning of the world and the personal happiness of the people in it is maintained by the correct appreciation of one's place. This is not to say Guo denies the possibility of growth and change, which are clear and necessary parts of nature, including social systems. In the same way that the body has hands, feet and head that play different roles according to their different endowments, so the world functions best when people act according to their proper fen. Thus, one's fen is both the allotment of qi received from heaven and the role one must maintain within the system. Indeed, there is no difference between natural abilities and social obligations.

d. The Sage

For Guo, the Sage (shengren) is someone who directs his talent and understanding for the benefit of society. The phrase neisheng waiwang describes someone who is internally like a sage and outwardly acts as a ruler. In Guo's view, the former necessitates the latter. In chapter one of the Zhuangzi, we read the story of the sage ruler Yao, who attempts to cede his throne to the recluse Xu You, but is rebuffed. In the story, it is clear that Xu You has a greater level of understanding than does Yao, but Guo's commentary presents the matter differently:

Are we to insist that a man fold his arms and sit in silence in the middle of some mountain forest before we say that he is practicing nonaction? This is why the words of Laozi and Zhuangzi are rejected by responsible officials. This is why responsible officials insist on remaining in the realm of action without regret … egotistical people set themselves in opposition to things, while he who is in accord with things is not opposed to them … therefore he profoundly and deeply responds to things without any deliberate mind of his own and follows whatever comes into contact with him … he who is always with the people no matter what he does is the ruler of the world wherever he may be. (Zhuangzi commentary, chapter 1)

It seems clear from these sentiments that in Guo's view not only is Yao a better model for a ruler than Xu You, but also that Confucius is a better model for a sage than Zhuangzi.

3. Guo Xiang's Influence on Chinese Thought

The Zhuangzi has long been held in high regard as one of the main pillars of Daoist philosophy, as well as one of the most accessible, entertaining and popular philosophical works of any genre. However the important contribution of Guo to the way in which we understand the Zhuangzi is less well known, particularly in its non-Chinese translations. He deserves credit not only for the external editing and arrangement of the text, but more importantly for developing a philosophical framework that allows for the continued dominance of accepted Confucian codes of proper behavior, yet still keeps open philosophical discussion of wider insights on the nature of reality. While the earlier work of Wang Bi may have eased the entry of Buddhism into the Chinese mainstream, it is within the framework provided by Guo that the three strands of Buddhism, Daoism and Confucianism have found a strategy for coexistence that has contributed to the success and growth of them all.

4. References and Further Reading

  • Allison, Robert E. Chuang-Tzu for Spiritual Transformation. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1990.
  • Aoki, Goro. "Kaku Sho Soshichu shisen" [Examining Guo Xiang's Zhuangzi commentary]. Kyoto kyoiku gaku kiyo 55 (1979): 196-202.
  • Chan, Alan K.L. "Guo Xiang." In The Encyclopedia of Chinese Philosophy, ed. Anthonio S. Cua, New York: Routledge, 2003, 280-284.
  • Chan, Wing-tsit, ed. A Source Book in Chinese Philosophy. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1963.
    • A good selection of translated passages in addition to an excellent treatment of Guo Xiang's thought and xuanxue in general.
  • Feng, Yu-lan (Feng Youlan) trans. Chuang Tzu: A New Selected Translation with an Exposition of the Philosophy of Kuo Hsiang, Shanghai: Commercial Press, 1933. (Reprint, New York: Gordon, 1975.)
  • Feng, Yu-lan (Feng Youlan). A History of Chinese Philsosophy, v. 2, trans. Derk Bodde. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1953.
  • Fukunaga, Mitsuji. "Kako Sho no Soshi chu to Ko Shu no Shoshi chu" [Guo Xiang's Zhuangzi commentary and Xiang Xiu's Zhuangzi commentary]. Toho gakuho 36 (1964): 187-215.
    • This was some of the groundbreaking work on the Xiang Xiu controversy. Its findings are summarized in English by Livia Knaul's article in The Journal of Chinese Religions.
  • Fukunaga, Mitsuji. "‘No-Mind' in Chuang-tzu and Ch'an Buddhism." Zinbun 12 (1969): 9-45.
  • Holtzman, Donald. "Les sept sages de la forêt des bambous et la société de leur temps." T'oung Pao 44 (1956): 317-346.
  • Knaul, Livia. "Lost Chuang-tzu Passages." Journal of Chinese Religions 10 (1982): 53-79.
    • This article contains a translation of the "lost" postface, as well as a detailed treatment of the Xiang Xiu controversy.
  • Knaul, Livia. "The Winged Life: Kuo Hsiang's Mystical Philosophy." Journal of Chinese Studies 2.1 (1985): 17-41.
  • Kohn, Livia. Early Chinese Mysticism: Philosophy and Soteriology in the Taoist Tradition. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1992.
  • Kohn, Livia. "Kuo Hsiang and the Chuang-tzu." Journal of Chinese Philosophy 12 (1985): 429-447.
  • Mair, Victor H., ed. Experimental Essays on Chuang-tzu. Honolulu: University of Hawaii Press, 1983.
  • Mather, Richard B. "The Controversy Over Conformity and Naturalness During the Six Dynasties." History of Religions 9 (1969-1970): 160-180.
  • Robinet, Isabelle. "Kouo Siang ou le monde comme absolu." T'oung Pao 69 (1983): 73-107.
  • Tang Yijie. Guo Xiang. Taibei: Dongda tushugongsi, 1999.
    • One of the most acclaimed biographers of Guo Xiang. Not currently translated into English.
  • Yü, Ying-shih. "Individualism and the Neo-Taoist Movement in Wei-Chin China." In Individualism and Holism: Studies in Confucian and Taoist Values, ed. Donald Munro (Ann Arbor: Center for Chinese Studies, University of Michigan, 1985), 121-155.
  • Ziporyn, Brook. The Penumbra Unbound: The Neo-Taoist Philosophy of Guo Xiang. Albany: State University of New York Press, 2003.
  • Ziporyn, Brook. "The Self-So and Its Traces in the Thought of Guo Xiang." Philosophy East and West 43 (1993): 511-539.
  • Zhuang Yaolang. Guo Xiang xuanxue. Taibei: Liren shuju, 2002.

Author Information

J. Scot Brackenridge
Long Island University
U. S. A.

William of Ockham (Occam, c. 1280—c. 1349)

William of OckhamWilliam of Ockham, also known as William Ockham and William of Occam, was a fourteenth-century English philosopher. Historically, Ockham has been cast as the outstanding opponent of Thomas Aquinas (1224-1274): Aquinas perfected the great “medieval synthesis” of faith and reason and was canonized by the Catholic Church; Ockham destroyed the synthesis and was condemned by the Catholic Church. Although it is true that Aquinas and Ockham disagreed on most issues, Aquinas had many other critics, and Ockham did not criticize Aquinas any more than he did others. It is fair enough, however, to say that Ockham was a major force of change at the end of the Middle Ages. He was a courageous man with an uncommonly sharp mind. His philosophy was radical in his day and continues to provide insight into current philosophical debates.

The principle of simplicity is the central theme of Ockham’s approach, so much so that this principle has come to be known as “Ockham’s Razor.” Ockham uses the razor to eliminate unnecessary hypotheses. In metaphysics, Ockham champions nominalism, the view that universal essences, such as humanity or whiteness, are nothing more than concepts in the mind. He develops an Aristotelian ontology, admitting only individual substances and qualities. In epistemology, Ockham defends direct realist empiricism, according to which human beings perceive objects through “intuitive cognition,” without the help of any innate ideas. These perceptions give rise to all of our abstract concepts and provide knowledge of the world. In logic, Ockham presents a version of supposition theory to support his commitment to mental language. Supposition theory had various purposes in medieval logic, one of which was to explain how words bear meaning. Theologically, Ockham is a fideist, maintaining that belief in God is a matter of faith rather than knowledge. Against the mainstream, he insists that theology is not a science and rejects all the alleged proofs of the existence of God. Ockham’s ethics is a divine command theory. In the Euthyphro dialogue, Plato (437-347 B.C.E.) poses the following question: Is something good because God wills it or does God will something because it is good? Although most philosophers affirm the latter, divine command theorists affirm the former. Ockham’s divine command theory can be seen as a consequence of his metaphysical libertarianism. In political theory, Ockham advances the notion of rights, separation of church and state, and freedom of speech.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Works
  2. The Razor
  3. Metaphysics: Nominalism
  4. Epistemology
    1. Direct Realist Empiricism
    2. Intuitive Cognition
  5. Logic
    1. Mentalese
    2. Supposition Theory
    3. The Categories
  6. Theology
    1. Fideism
      1. Theology is Not a Science
      2. The Trinity is a Logical Contradiction
      3. There Is No Evidence of Purpose in the Natural World
    2. Against the Proofs of God’s Existence
      1. The Ontological Proof
      2. The Cosmological Proof
  7. Ethics
    1. Divine Command Theory
    2. Metaphysical Libertarianism
  8. Political Theory
    1. Rights
    2. Separation of Church and State
    3. Freedom of Speech
  9. References and Further Reading
    1. Ockham’s Works in Latin
    2. Ockham’s Works in English Translation
    3. Books about Ockham

1. Life and Works

Very little biographical information about Ockham survives. There is a record of his ordination in the year 1306. From this, we infer that he was born between 1280 and 1285, presumably in the small town of Ockham, twenty-five miles southwest of London, England. The medieval church in this town, All Saints, recently installed a stained glass window of Ockham because it is probably the church in which he grew up. Nevertheless, we know nothing of Ockham’s childhood or family. Most likely, he spoke Middle English and wrote exclusively in Latin.

Because Ockham joined the Franciscan order (known as the Order of the Friars Minor or OFM), he would have received his early education at a Franciscan house. From there, he pursued a degree in theology at Oxford University. He never completed it, however, because in 1323 he was summoned to the papal court, which had been moved from Rome to Avignon, to answer to charges of heresy.

Ockham remained in Avignon under a loose form of house arrest for four years while the papacy carried out its investigation. Through this ordeal Ockham became convinced that the papacy was corrupt and finally decided to flee with some other Franciscans on trial there. On May 26, 1328 they escaped in the night on stolen horses to the court of Louis of Bavaria, a would-be emperor, who had his own reasons for opposing the Pope. They were all ex-communicated and hunted down but never captured.

After a brief and unsuccessful campaign in Italy, Louis and his entourage settled in Munich. Ockham spent the rest of his days there as a political activist, writing treatises against the papacy. Ockham died sometime between 1347 and 1349, unreconciled with the Catholic Church. Because he never returned to his academic career, Ockham acquired the nickname “Venerable Inceptor”—an “inceptor” being one who is on the point of earning a degree. Ockham’s other nickname is the “More than Subtle Doctor” because he was thought to have surpassed the Franciscan philosopher John Duns Scotus (1265/6-1308), who was known as the Subtle Doctor.

Methodologically, Ockham fits comfortably within the analytic philosophical tradition. He considers himself a devoted follower of Aristotle (384-322 B.C.E.), whom he calls “The Philosopher,” though most Aristotle scholars would find many of his interpretations dubious. Ockham may simply have a unique understanding of Aristotle or he may be using Aristotle as cover for developing views he knew would be threatening to the status quo.

Aside from Aristotle, the French Franciscan philosopher Peter John Olivi (1248 - 1298) was the single most important influence on Ockham. Olivi is an extremely original thinker, pioneering direct realism, nominalism, metaphysical libertarianism, and many of the same political views that Ockham defends later in his career. One notable difference between the two, however, is that, while Ockham loves Aristotle, Olivi hates him. Ockham never acknowledges Olivi because Olivi was condemned as a heretic.

Ockham published several philosophical works before losing official status as an academic. The first was his Commentary on the Sentences of Peter Lombard, a standard requirement for medieval theology students. The philosopher and archbishop Peter Lombard (1100–1160/4) composed a book of opinions (sententia) for and against various controversial claims. By commenting on this book, students would learn the art of argumentation while at the same time developing their own views. As a student, Ockham also wrote several commentaries on the works of Aristotle. In addition, he engaged in public debates, the proceedings of which were published under the titles Disputed Questions and Quodlibetal Questions—“quodlibet” meaning “whatever you like.” Ockham’s opus magnum, however, is his Suma Logicae, in which he lays out the fundamentals of his logic and its accompanying metaphysics. We do not know exactly when it was written, but it is the latest of his academic works. After the Avignon affair, Ockham wrote and circulated several political treatises unofficially, the most important of which is his Dialogue on the Power of the Emperor and the Pope. All of Ockham’s works have been edited into modern editions but not all have been translated.

2. The Razor

Ockham’s Razor is the principle of parsimony or simplicity according to which the simpler theory is more likely to be true. Ockham did not invent this principle; it is found in Aristotle, Aquinas, and other philosophers Ockham read. Nor did he call the principle a “razor.” In fact, the first known use of the term “Occam’s razor” occurs in 1852 in the work of the British mathematician William Rowan Hamilton. Although Ockham never even makes an argument for the validity of the principle, he uses it in many striking ways, and this is how it became associated with him.

For some, the principle of simplicity implies that the world is maximally simple. Aquinas, for example, argues that nature does not employ two instruments where one suffices. This interpretation of the principle is also suggested by its most popular formulation: “Entities should not be multiplied beyond necessity.” Yet this is a problematic assertion. We know today that nature is often redundant in both form and function. Although medieval philosophers were largely ignorant of evolutionary biology, they did affirm the existence of an omnipotent God, which is alone enough to render the assumption that the world is maximally simple suspicious. In any case, Ockham never makes this assumption and he does not use the popular formulation of the principle.

For Ockham, the principle of simplicity limits the multiplication of hypotheses not necessarily entities. Favoring the formulation “It is useless to do with more what can be done with less,” Ockham implies that theories are meant to do things, namely, explain and predict, and these things can be accomplished more effectively with fewer assumptions.

At one level, this is just common sense. Suppose your car suddenly stops running and your fuel gauge indicates an empty gas tank. It would be silly to hypothesize both that you are out of gas and that you are out of oil. You need only one hypothesis to explain what has happened.

Some would object that the principle of simplicity cannot guarantee truth. The gas gauge on your car may be broken or the empty gas tank may be just one of several things wrong with the car. In response to this objection, one might point out that the principle of simplicity does not tell us which theory is true but only which theory is more likely to be true. Moreover, if there is some other sign of damage, such as a blinking oil gage, then there is a further fact to explain, warranting an additional hypothesis.

Although the razor seems like common sense in everyday situations, when used in science, it can have surprising and powerful effects. For example, in his classic exposition of theoretical physics, A Brief History of Time, Stephen Hawking attributes the discovery of quantum mechanics to Ockham’s Razor.

Nevertheless, not everyone approves of the razor. Ockham’s contemporary and fellow Franciscan Walter Chatton proposed an “anti-razor” in opposition to Ockham. He declares that if three things are not enough to verify an affirmative proposition about things, a fourth must be added, and so on. Others call Ockham’s razor a “principle of stinginess,” accusing it of quashing creativity and imagination. Still others complain that there is no objective way to determine which of two theories is simpler. Often a theory that is simpler in one way is more complicated in another way. All of these concerns and others make Ockham’s razor controversial.

At bottom, Ockham advocates simplicity in order to reduce the risk of error. Every hypothesis carries the possibility that it may be wrong. The more hypotheses you accept, the more you increase your risk. Ockham strove to avoid error at all times, even if it meant abandoning well-loved, traditional beliefs. This approach helped to earn him his reputation as destroyer of the medieval synthesis of faith and reason.

3. Metaphysics: Nominalism

One of the most basic challenges in metaphysics is to explain how it is that things are the same despite differences. The Greek philosopher Heraclitus (540 - 480 B.C.E.) points out that you can never step into the same river twice, referring not just to rivers, but to places, people, and life itself. Every day everything changes a little bit and everywhere you go you find new things. Heraclitus concludes from such observations that nothing ever remains the same. All reality is in flux.

The problem with seeing the world this way is that it leads to radical skepticism: if nothing stays the same from moment to moment and from place to place, then we can never really be certain about anything. We can’t know our friends, we can’t know the world we live in, we can’t even know ourselves! Moreover, if Heraclitus is right, it seems science is impossible. We could learn the properties of a chemical here today and still have no basis for knowing its properties someplace else tomorrow.

Needless to say, most people would prefer to avoid skepticism. It’s hard to carry on in a state of complete ignorance. Besides, it seems obvious that science is not impossible. Studying the world really does enable us to know how things are over time and across distances. The fact that things change through time and vary from place to place does not seem to prevent us from having knowledge. From this, some philosophers, such as Plato and Augustine (354-430), draw the conclusion that Heraclitus was wrong to suppose that everything is in flux. Something stays the same, something that lays underneath the changing and varying surfaces we perceive, namely, the universal essence of things.

For example, although individual human beings change from day to day and vary from place to place, they all share the universal essence of humanity, which is eternally the same. Likewise for dogs, trees, rocks, and even qualities—there must be a universal essence of blueness, heat, love, and anything else one can think of. Universal essences are not physical realities; if you dissect a human being, you will not find humanity inside like a kidney or a lung! Nevertheless, universal essences are metaphysical realities: they provide the invisible structure of things.

Belief in universal essences is called “metaphysical realism,” because it asserts that universal essences are real even though we cannot physically see them. Although there are various different versions of metaphysical realism, they are all designed to secure a foundation for knowledge. It seems you have a choice: either you accept metaphysical realism or you are stuck with skepticism.

Ockham, however, argues that this is a false dilemma. He rejects metaphysical realism and skepticism in favor of nominalism: the view that universal essences are concepts in the mind. The word “nominalism” comes from the Latin word nomina, meaning name. Earlier nominalists such as the French philosopher Roscelin (1050-1125), had advanced the more radical view that universal essences are just names that have no basis in reality. Ockham developed a more sophisticated version of nominalism often called “conceptualism” because it holds that universal essences are concepts caused in our minds when we perceive real similarities among things in the world.

For example, when a child comes in contact with different human beings over time, he begins to form the concept of humanity. The realist would say that he has detected the invisible common structure of these individuals. Ockham, in contrast, insists that the child has merely perceived similarities that fit naturally under one concept.

It is tempting to assume that Ockham rejects metaphysical realism because of the principle of simplicity. After all, realism requires believing in invisible entities that might not actually exist. As a matter of fact, however, Ockham never uses the razor to attack realism. And on closer examination, this makes sense: the realist position is that the existence of universal essences is a hypothesis necessary to explain how science is possible. Since Ockham was just as concerned as everyone else to avoid skepticism, he might have been persuaded by such an argument.

Ockham has a much deeper worry about realism: he is convinced it is incoherent. Incoherence is the most serious charge a philosopher can level against a theory because it means that the theory contains a contradiction—and contradictions cannot be true. Ockham asserts that metaphysical realism cannot be true because it holds that a universal essence is one thing and many things at the same time. The form of humanity is one thing, because it is what all humans have in common, but it is also many things because it provides an invisible structure of each individual one of us. This is to say that it is both one thing and not one thing at the same time, which is a contradiction.

Realists claim that this apparent contradiction can be explained in various ways. Ockham insists, however, that no matter how you explain it, there is no way to avoid the fact that the notion of a universal essence is an impossible hypothesis. He writes,

There is no universal outside the mind really existing in individual substances or in the essences of things.... The reason is that everything that is not many things is necessarily one thing in number and consequently a singular thing. [Opera Philosophica II, pp. 11-12]

Ockham presents a thought experiment to prove universal essences do not exist. He writes that, according to realism, would follow that God would not be able to annihilate one individual substance without destroying the other individuals of the same kind. For, if he were to annihilate one individual, he would destroy the whole that is essentially that individual and, consequently, he would destroy the universal that is in it and in others of the same essence. Other things of the same essence would not remain, for they could not continue to exist without the universal that constitutes a part of them. [Opera Philosophica I, p. 51]

Since God is omnipotent, he should be able to annihilate a human being. But the universal form of humanity lies within that human being. So, by destroying the individual, he will destroy the universal. And if he destroys the universal, which is humanity, then he destroys all the other humans as well.

The realist may wish to reply that destroying an individual human destroys only part of the universal humanity. But this contradicts the original assertion that the universal humanity is a single shared essence that is eternally the same for everyone! For Ockham, this problem decisively defeats realism and leaves us with the nominalist alternative that universals are concepts caused in our minds when we perceive similar individuals. To support this alternative, Ockham develops an empiricist epistemology.

4. Epistemology

a. Direct Realist Empiricism

Epistemology is the study of knowledge: what is it, and how do we come to have it? There are two basic approaches to epistemology: rationalists claim that knowledge consists of innate certainties that we discover through reason; empiricists claim that knowledge consists in accurate perceptions that we accumulate through experience. Although early medieval philosophers such as Augustine and Anselm (1033-1109) were innatists, empiricism came to dominate during the high Middle Ages. This is mostly because Aristotle was an empiricist and the texts in which he promotes empiricism were rediscovered and translated for the first time into Latin during the thirteenth century.

Following Aristotle, Ockham asserts that human beings are born blank states: there are no innate certainties to be discovered in our minds. We learn by observing qualities in objects. Ockham’s version of empiricism is called “direct realism” because he denies that there is any intermediary between the perceiver and the world. (Note that direct realism should not be confused with metaphysical realism, which Ockham rejects, as discussed above.) Direct realism states that if you see an apple, its redness causes you to know that it is red. This may seem obvious, but it actually raises a problem that has led many empiricists, both in Ockham’s day and today, to reject direct realism.

As the French philosopher Peter Aureol (1275-1333) points out, the problem is that there are cases where we perceive something that is not really there. In optical illusions, hallucinations, and dreams, our perceptions are completely disconnected with the external world.

Representationalism is the version of empiricism designed to solve this problem. According to representationalists, human beings perceive the world through a mental mediary, or representation, known in the Middle Ages as the “intelligible species.” Normally, an apple causes an intelligible species of itself for us to perceive it through. In cases of optical illusions, hallucinations, and dreams, something else causes the intelligible species. The perception seems veridical to us because there is no difference in the intelligible species. Even before Peter Aureol, Thomas Aquinas advocated representationalism, and it soon became the dominant view.

The difficulty with representationalism, as the Irish philosopher George Berkeley (1685-1754) amply demonstrates, is that once you introduce an intermediary between the perceiver and the external world, you lose your justification for belief in the external world. If all of our ideas come through representations, how do we know what, if anything, is behind these representations? Something other than physical objects could be causing them. For example, God could be transmitting representations of physical objects to our minds without ever creating any physical objects at all—which is in fact what Berkeley came to believe. This view, known as idealism, is radically skeptical, and most philosophers prefer to avoid it.

b. Intuitive Cognition

Ockham preempts idealism through the notion of intuitive cognition, which plays a crucial role in his four-step account of knowledge acquisition. It can be summarized as follows. The first step is sensory cognition: receiving data through the five senses. This is an ability human beings share with animals. The second step, intuitive cognition, is uniquely human. Intuitive cognition is an awareness that the particular individual perceived exists and has the qualities it has. The third step is recordative cognition, by which we remember past perceptions. The fourth step is abstractive cognition, by which we place individuals in groups of similar individuals.

Notice that, if an apple is set in front of a horse, the horse will receive data about the apple—the color, the smell, etc.—and react appropriately. The horse will not, however, register the reality of the object. Suppose you project a realistic, laser image of an apple in front of the horse and he tries to take a bite. He will become frustrated, and eventually give up, but he will never really “get it.” Human beings, in contrast, have reality-sensitive minds. It’s not a matter of thinking “This is real” every time we see something. On the contrary, Ockham asserts that intuitive cognition is non-propositional. Rather, it is a matter of registering that the apple really has the qualities we perceive. Ockham writes:

Intuitive cognition is such that when some things are cognized, of which one inheres in the other, or one is spatially distant from the other, or exists in some relation to the other, immediately in virtue of that non-propositional cognition of those things, it is known if the thing inheres or does not inhere, if it is spatially distant or not, and the same for other true contingent propositions, unless that cognition is flawed or there is some impediment. [Opera Theologica I, p. 31]

While intuitive cognition is itself non-propositional, it provides the basis for formulating true propositions. A horse cannot say “This apple is red” because its mind is not complex enough to register the reality of what it perceives. The human mind, registering the existence of things—both that they are and how they are—can therefore formulate assertions about them.

Strictly speaking, when one has an intuitive cognition of an apple, one is not yet thinking of it as an apple, because this requires placing it in a group. In normal adult human perception, all four of the above steps happen together so quickly that it is hard to separate them. But try to imagine what perception is like for a toddler: she sees the round, red object and points to it saying “That!” This is an expression of intuitive cognition.

Intuitive cognition secures a causal link between the external world and the human mind. The human mind is entirely passive, according to Ockham, during intuitive cognition. Objects in the world cause us to be aware of their existence, and this explains and justifies our belief in them.

Despite his insistence on the causal link between the world and our minds, Ockham clearly recognizes cases in which intuitive cognition causes false judgment. (See the last line of the above quotation: “...unless that cognition is flawed or there is some impediment.”) For example, when you see a stick half-emerged in water, it looks bent. This is because your intuitive cognition of the stick is being affected by your simultaneous intuitive cognition of the water, and this causes a skewed perception. In addition to leaving room for error on his account, Ockham also leaves room for skepticism: God can transmit representations to human beings that seem exactly like intuitive cognitions.

Given that direct realism cannot rule out skepticism any more than representationalism can, one might wonder why Ockham prefers it. In the end, it is a question of simplicity. Whereas Ockham never uses his razor against metaphysical realism, he does use it against representationalism. Intuitive cognition is necessary to secure a causal link between the world and the mind, and, once it is in place, there is no need for a middle man. The intelligible species is an unnecessary hypothesis.

It is worth noting that intuitive cognition also provides epistemological support for Ockham’s nominalist metaphysics. Representationalists typically hold that the intelligible species emanates from the universal essence of the thing. In their view, you perceive an apple as an apple because the apple’s universal essence of appleness is conveyed to you through its intelligible species. In fact, many metaphysical realists would argue for the superiority of their view precisely on the grounds that universal essences provide a basis for intelligible species, and intelligible species are necessary for us to know what we are perceiving. They would ask: how else do we ever identify apples as apples instead of just so many distinct individuals?

As we have seen, Ockham argues that there is no universal essence. There is therefore no basis for an intelligible species. Each object in the world is an absolute individual and that is how we perceive it at first. Just like toddlers, we are bombarded with a buzzing, booming confusion of colors and sounds. But our minds are powerful sorting machines. We remember perceptions over time (recordative cognition) and organize them into groups (abstractive cognition). This organizational process gives us a coherent understanding of the world and is what Ockham aims to explain in his account of logic.

5. Logic

a. Mentalese

Although the human mind is born without any knowledge, according to Ockham, it does come fully equip with a system for processing perceptions as they are acquired. This system is thought, which Ockham understands in terms of an unspoken, mental language. He is therefore considered an advocate of “mentalese,” like the American philosopher Noam Chomsky.

Ockham might compare thought to a machine ready to manipulate a vast quantity of empty boxes. As we observe the world, perceptions are placed in the empty boxes. Then the machine sorts and organizes the boxes according to content. Two small boxes with similar contents might be placed together in a big box, and then the big box might be conjoined to another big box. For example, as perceptions of Rover and Fido accumulate, they become the concept dog, and then the concept dog is associated with the concept fleas. This conceptual apparatus enables us to construct meaningful sentences, such as “All dogs have fleas.”

The intuitive cognition in Ockham’s epistemology provides a basis for what is today called a “causal theory of reference” in philosophy of language. The word “dog” means dog because the concept you think of when you write it or say it was caused by the dogs you have perceived. Dogs cause the same kinds of concepts in all human beings. Thus, mentalese is universal among us, even though there are different ways to speak and write words in different countries around the world. While written and spoken language is conventional, signification itself is natural.

Early in his career, Ockham entertained the notion that concepts are mental objects or “ficta” which resemble objects in the world like pictures. He abandoned ficta theory, however, because it presupposes a representationalist epistemology, which in turn presupposes metaphysical realism. Arguing instead for “intellectum theory,” according to which objects can have causal impact on the mind without creating mental pictures of themselves; he offers the following analogy. Medieval pubs received wine in shipments of wooden barrels sealed with hoops. When the shipment arrived, the pub owner would hang a barrel hoop outside the front door to communicate to the townspeople that wine was available. Although the hoop did not resemble wine in any way, it was significant to the townspeople. This is because the presence of the hoop was caused by the arrival of the wine. Likewise, dogs in the world cause concepts in our minds that are significant even though they do not resemble dogs.

It must be noted that there is a drawback to both the barrel hoop analogy and the box illustration: they portray concepts as things. For convenience, Ockham often speaks of concepts loosely as though they were things. However, according to intellectum theory, concepts are not really things at all but rather actions. Perceiving a dog does not cause an entity to exist in your mind; rather, it causes a mental act. Today we would say that it causes a neuron to fire. Repeated acts cause a habit: the disposition to perform the act at will. So, repeated perceptions of dogs cause repeated acts of dog-conceiving and those repeated acts cause a dog-conceiving habit, meaning that you can engage in dog-conceiving actions whenever you want, even when there are no dogs around to perceive.

b. Supposition Theory

In Ockham’s view, any coherent thought we have requires connecting or disconnecting concepts by means of linguistic operators. Ockham has a lot of ideas about how the linguistic operators work, which he develops in his version of supposition theory. Although supposition theory was a major preoccupation of late medieval logicians, scholars are still divided over its purpose. Some think it was an effort to build a system of formal logic that ultimately failed. Others think it was more akin to a modern theory of logical form.

Ockham’s interest in supposition theory seems motivated by his concern to clarify conceptual confusion. Much like Ludwig Wittgenstein (1889-1951), Ockham asserts that many philosophical errors arise due to the misunderstanding of language. He took metaphysical realism to be a prime example. Conceiving of human beings in general leads us to use the word “humanity.” Metaphysical realists conclude that this word must refer to a universal essence within all human beings. For Ockham, however, the word “humanity” stands for a habit that enables us to conceive of all the human beings we have perceived to date in a very efficient manner: stripped of all of their individual details. In this way, Ockham’s supposition theory is designed to support his nominalist metaphysics while elucidating the rules of thought.

The word “supposition” comes from the Latin word “stand for” but it closely approximates the technical notion known as “reference” in English. At its most basic level, supposition theory tells us how words used in sentences, which Ockham calls “terms,” refer to things.

Medieval logicians recognize three types of supposition—material, personal and simple—but their metaphysical commitments affect their analyses. Most everyone agrees about material supposition. It occurs when a term is mentioned rather than used, as is the term “stop” in the sentence, “The sign says ‘stop.’” But they disagree over personal and simple supposition. For Ockham, personal supposition occurs when a term stands for an object in the world, as does the term “cat” in the sentence, “The cat is on the mat” and simple supposition occurs when a term stands for a concept in the mind, as does “horse” in the sentence, “Horse is a species.” For Ockham’s realist opponents, in contrast, the term “species” stands for a universal essence, which is an object in the world. They therefore have a different account of personal and simple supposition.

In addition to three types of supposition, medieval logicians recognize two types of terms: categorematic and syncategorematic. Categorematic terms refer to existing things and are called “categorematic” because, in his Organon, Aristotle asserts that there are ten categories of existing things. Syncategorematic terms do not refer to anything at all. They are logical operators, such as “all,” “not,” “if,” and “only,” which tell how to associate or disassociate the categorematic terms in a sentence.

Among categorematic terms, some are absolute names while others are connotative names. Ockham describes the difference as follows:

Properly speaking, only absolute names, that is, concepts signifying things composed of matter and form, have definitions expressing real essence. Some examples of this sort of name are “human being,” “lion,” and “goat.” Connotative and relative names, on the other hand, which signify one thing directly and another thing indirectly, have definitions expressing nominal essence. Some examples of this sort of name are “white,” “hot,” “parent,” and “child.” [Opera Philosophica IX, p. 554]

The terms “human being” and “parent” are both names for Betty. The term “human being” signifies Betty in an absolute way because it refers to her alone as an independently existing object. The term “parent” signifies Betty in a connotative way because it signifies her while at the same time signifying her children.

c. The Categories

Although the distinction between absolute and connotative terms seems minor, Ockham uses it for radical purposes. According to the standard reading of the Organon, Aristotle holds that there are ten categories of existing things as follows: substance, quality, quantity, relation, place, time, position, state, action, and passion. According to Ockham’s reading, however, Aristotle holds that there are only two categories of existing things: substance and quality. Ockham bases his interpretation on the thesis that only substances and qualities have real essence definitions signifying things composed of matter and form. The other eight categories signify a substance or a quality while connoting something else. They therefore have nominal essence definitions, meaning that they are not existing things.

Consider quantity. Suppose you have one orange. It is a substance with a real essence of citrus fruit. Furthermore, it possesses several qualities, such as its color, its flavor, and its smell. The orange and its qualities are existing things according to Ockham. But the orange is also singular. Is its singularity an existing thing? For mathematical Platonists, the answer is yes: the number one exists as a universal essence and inheres in the orange. Ockham, in contrast, asserts that the singularity of the orange is just a short hand way of saying that there are no other oranges nearby. So, in the sentence “Here is one orange” the term “one” is connotative: it directly signifies the orange itself while indirectly signifying all the other oranges that are not here. Ockham eliminates the rest of the categories along the same lines.

Interestingly, Ockham’s elimination of quantity precipitated his summons to Avignon because it pushed him to a new account of the sacrament of the altar. The sacrament of the altar is the miracle that is supposed to occur when bread and wine are transformed into the body and blood of Jesus Christ. This process is known in theology as “transubstantiation” because one substance changes into another substance. The problem is to explain why the bread and wine continue to look, smell, and taste exactly the same despite the underlying change. According to the standard account, the qualities of the bread and wine continue to inhere in their quantity, which remains the same while substances are exchanged. According to Ockham, however, quantity is nothing other than the substance itself; if the substance changes then the quantity changes. So, the qualities cannot continue to inhere in the same quantity. Nor can they transfer from the substance of the bread and wine into the substance of Jesus because it would be blasphemous to say that Jesus was crunchy or wet! Ockham’s solution is to claim that the qualities of the bread and wine continue to exist all by themselves, accompanying the invisible substance of Jesus down the gullet. Needless to say, this solution was a bit too clever.

One question scholars continue to ask is why Ockham allows for two of the ten categories to remain instead of just one, namely, substance. It seems that qualities, such as whiteness, crunchiness, sweetness, etc, can just as easily be reduced to nominal essences: they signify the substance itself while connoting the tongue or nose or eye that perceives it. Of course, if Ockham had eliminated quality, he really would have had no basis left for saving the miracle of transubstantiation. Perhaps that was reason enough to stay his razor.

6. Theology

a. Fideism

Despite his departures from orthodoxy and his conflict with the papacy, Ockham never renounced Catholicism. He steadfastly embraced fideism, the view that belief in God is a matter of faith alone. Although fideism was soon to become common among Protestant thinkers, it was not so common among medieval Catholics. At the beginning of the Middle Ages, Augustine proposed a proof of the existence of God and promoted the view that reason is faith seeking understanding. While the standard approach for any medieval philosopher would be to recognize a role for both faith and reason in religion, Ockham makes an uncompromising case for faith alone.

Three assertions reveal Ockham to be a fideist.

i. Theology is Not a Science

The word “science” comes from the Latin word “scientia,” meaning knowledge. In the first book of his Sentences, Peter Lombard raises the issue of whether and in what sense theology is a science. Most philosophers commenting on the Sentences found a way to cast faith as a way of knowing. Ockham, however, makes no such effort. As a staunch empiricist, Ockham is committed to the thesis that all knowledge comes from experience. Yet we have no experience of God. It follows inescapably that we have no knowledge of God, as Ockham affirms in the following passage:

In order to demonstrate the statement of faith that we formulate about God, what we would need for the central concept is a simple cognition of the divine nature in itself—what someone who sees God has. Nevertheless, we cannot have this kind of cognition in our present state. [Quodlibetal Questions, pp. 103-4]

By “present state” Ockham is referring to life on earth as a human being. Just as we now have knowledge of others through intuitive cognitions of their individual essences, those who go to heaven (if there ever are any such) will have knowledge of God through intuitive cognitions of his essence. Until then we can only hope.

ii. The Trinity is a Logical Contradiction

The Trinity is the core Christian doctrine according to which God is three persons in one. Christians traditionally consider the Trinity a mystery, meaning that it is beyond the comprehension of the human mind. Ockham goes so far as to admit that it is a blatant contradiction. He displays the problem through the following syllogism:

According to the doctrine of the Trinity:

(1) God is the Father,


(2) Jesus is God.

Therefore, by transitivity, according to the doctrine of the Trinity:

(3) Jesus is the Father.

Yet, according to the doctrine of the Trinity, Jesus is not the Father.

So, according to the doctrine of the Trinity, Jesus both is and is not the Father.

Providing precedent for a recent presidential defense, many medieval philosophers suggested that the transitive inference to the conclusion is broken by different senses of the word “is.” Scotus creatively argues that the logic of the Trinity is an opaque context that does not obey the usual rules. For Ockham, however, this syllogism establishes that theology is not logical and must never be mixed with philosophy.

iii. There Is No Evidence of Purpose in the Natural World

Living prior to the advent of Christianity, Aristotle never believed in the Trinity. He does, however, seem to believe in a supernatural force that lends purpose to all of nature. This is evident in his doctrine of the Four Causes, according to which every existing thing requires a fourfold explanation. Ockham would cast these four causes in terms of the following four questions:

First Cause: What is it made of?
Second Cause: What does it do?
Third Cause: What brought it about?
Fourth Cause: Why does it do what it does?

Most medieval philosophers found Aristotle’s four causes conducive to the Christian worldview, assimilating the fourth cause to the doctrine of divine providence, according to which everything that happens is ultimately part of God’s plan.

Though Ockham was reluctant to disagree with Aristotle, he was so determined to keep theology separate from science and philosophy, that he felt compelled to criticize the fourth (which he calls “final”) cause. Ockham writes,

If I accepted no authority, I would claim that it cannot be proved either from statements known in themselves or from experience that every effect has a final cause.... Someone who is just following natural reason would claim that the question “why?” is inappropriate in the case of natural actions. For he would maintain that it is no real question to ask something like, “For what reason is fire generated?” [Quodlibetal Questions, pp. 246-9]

No doubt Ockham put his criticism in hypothetical, third-person terms because he knew that openly asserting that the universe itself may be entirely purposeless would never pass muster with the powers that be.

b. Against the Proofs of God’s Existence

Needless to say, Ockham rejects all of the alleged proofs of the existence of God. Two of the most important proofs then, as now, were Anselm’s ontological proof and Thomas Aquinas’s cosmological proof. Although the former is based on rationalist thinking and the latter is based on empiricist thinking, they boil down to very similar strategies, in Ockham’s view. There were, of course, many different versions of each of these proofs circulating in Ockham’s day just as there are today. Ockham thinks that the most plausible version of each boils down to an infinite regress argument of the following form:

If God does not exist, then there is an infinite regress.
But infinite regresses are impossible.
Therefore, God must exist.

The reason Ockham finds this argument form to be the most plausible is that he fully agrees with the second premise, that infinite regresses are impossible. If it were possible to show that God’s non-existence implied an infinite regress, then Ockham would accept the inference to his existence. Ockham denies, however, that God’s non-existence implies any such thing.

In order to understand Ockham’s aversion to infinite regress, it is necessary to understand Aristotle’s distinction between extensive and intensive infinity. An extensive infinity is an uncountable quantity of actually existing things. Mathematical Platonists conceive of the set of whole numbers as an extensive infinity. Ockham, however, deems the idea of an uncountable quantity contradictory: if the objects exist, then God can count them, and if God can count them, then they are not uncountable. An intensive infinity, on the other hand, is just a lack of limitation. As a nominalist, Ockham understands the set of whole numbers to be an intensive infinity in the sense that there is no upward limit on how far someone can count. This does not mean that the set of whole numbers are an uncountable quantity of actually existing things. Ockham thinks that infinite regresses are impossible only in so far as they imply extensive infinity.

i. The Ontological Proof

According to Ockham, advocates of the ontological proof reason as follows: There would be an infinite regress among entities if there were not one greatest entity. Therefore, there must be one greatest entity, namely God.

One way to counter this reasoning would be to deny that greatness is an objectively existing quality. Ockham does not, however, take this approach. On the contrary, he seems to take the Great Chain of Being for granted. The Great Chain of Being is a doctrine prevalent throughout the Middle Ages and beyond. According to it, all of nature can be ranked on a hierarchy of value from top to bottom, roughly as follows: God, angels, humans, animals, plants, rocks. The Great Chain of Being implies that greatness is an objectively existing quality.

Ockham’s curt response to the ontological argument is that it does not prove that there is just one greatest entity. Bearing the Great Chain of Being in mind, it is evident what he means to say. If God and the angels do not exist, then human beings are the greatest entities, and there is no single best among us. Notice that, even if there were a single best among humans, he or she would be a “god” in a very different sense than is required by Catholic orthodoxy.

Some scholars have interpreted Ockham to mean that the ontological argument succeeds in proving that the Father, the Son, and the Holy Ghost exist, but not that they are one. It is not clear, however, how Ockham’s empiricism could permit such a conclusion.

ii. The Cosmological Proof

According to Ockham, advocates of the cosmological argument reason as follows: There would be an infinite regress among causes if there were not a first cause; therefore, there must be a first cause, namely, God.

There are two different ways to understand “cause” in this argument: efficient cause and conserving cause. An efficient cause brings about an effect successively over time. For example, your grandparents were the efficient cause of your parents who were the efficient cause of you. A conserving cause, in contrast, is a simultaneous support for an effect. For example, the oxygen in the room is a conserving cause of the burning flame on the candle.

In Ockham’s view, the cosmological argument fails using either type of causality. Consider efficient causality first. If the chain of efficient causes that have produced the world as we know it today had no beginning, then it would form, not an extensive infinity, but an intensive infinity, which is harmless. Since the links in the chain would not all exist at the same time, they would not constitute an uncountable quantity of actually existing things. Rather, they would simply imply that the universe is an eternal cycle of unlimited or perpetual motion. Ockham explicitly affirms that it is possible that the world had no beginning, as Aristotle maintained.

Next, consider conserving causality. Conceiving of the world as a product of simultaneous conserving causes is difficult. The idea is perhaps best expressed in a story reported by Stephen Hawking. According to the story, a scientist was giving a lecture on astronomy. After the lecture, an elderly lady came up and told the scientist that he had it all wrong. “The world is really a flat plate supported on the back of a giant tortoise.” The scientist asked “And what is the turtle standing on?” To which the lady triumphantly replied: “You’re very clever, young man, but it’s no use – it’s turtles all the way down.”

Ockham readily grants that if the world has to be “held up” by conserving causes, then there must be a first among them because otherwise the set of conserving causes would constitute an uncountable quantity of actually existing things. It is in fact a tenet of belief that God is both an efficient and conserving cause of the cosmos, and Ockham accepts this tenet on faith. He handily points out, however, that, just as the cosmos need not have a beginning; it need not be “held up” in this way at all. Each existing thing may be its own conserving cause. Hence the cosmological argument is entirely inconclusive.

Ockham’s fideism amounts to a refusal to rely on the God hypothesis for theory building. It is worth bearing in mind that there were no philosophy departments or philosophy degrees in the Middle Ages. A student’s only choices for graduate school were law, medicine, or theology. Wanting to be a philosopher, Ockham studied theology and ran through his theological exercises, all the while trying to carve out a separate space for philosophy. The one area where the two worlds collide inextricably for him is in ethics.

7. Ethics

a. Divine Command Theory

Many people think God commands human beings to be kind because kindness is good and that God himself is always kind because his actions are always in conformity with goodness.

Although this was and still is the most common way of conceiving of the relationship between God and morality, Ockham disagrees. In his view, God does not conform to an independently existing standard of goodness; rather, God himself is the standard of goodness. This means it is not the case that God commands us to be kind because kindness is good. Rather, kindness is good because God commands it. Ockham was a divine command theorist: God’s will establishes right and wrong.

Divine command theory has always been unpopular because it carries one very unintuitive implication: if whatever God commands becomes right, and God can command whatever he wants, then God could command us always to be unkind and never to be kind, and then it would be right for us to be unkind and wrong for us to be kind. Kindness would be bad and unkindness would be good! How could this be?

In Ockham’s view, God always has commanded and always will command kindness. Nevertheless, it is possible for him to command otherwise. This possibility is a straightforward requirement of divine omnipotence: God can do anything that does not involve a contradiction. Of course, plenty of philosophers, such as Thomas Aquinas, insist that it is impossible for God to command us to be unkind simply because then God’s will would contradict his nature. For Ockham, however, this is the wrong way to conceive of God’s nature. The most important thing to understand about God’s nature, in Ockham’s view, is that it is maximally free. There are no constraints, external or internal, to what God can will. All of theology stands or falls with this thesis in Ockham’s view.

Ockham grants that it is hard to imagine a world in which God reverses his commands. Yet this is the price of preserving divine freedom. He writes,

I reply that hatred, theft, adultery, and the like may involve evil according to the common law, in so far as they are done by someone who is obligated by a divine command to perform the opposite act. As far as everything absolute in these actions is concerned, however, God can perform them without involving any evil. And they can even be performed meritoriously by someone on earth if they should fall under a divine command, just as now the opposite of these, in fact, fall under a divine command. [Opera Theologica V, p. 352]

One advantage of this approach is that it enables Ockham to make sense of some instances in the Old Testament where it looks as though God is commanding such things as murder (as in the case of Abraham sacrificing Isaac) and deception (as in the case of the Israelites despoiling the Egyptians). But biblical exegesis is not Ockham’s motive. His motive is to cast God as a paradigm of metaphysical freedom, so that he can make sense of human nature as made in his image.

b. Metaphysical Libertarianism

Metaphysical libertarianism is the view that human beings are responsible for their actions as individuals because they have free will, defined as the ability to do other than they do. Metaphysical libertarianism is opposed to determinism, according to which human beings do not have free will but rather are determined by antecedent conditions (such as God or nature or environmental factors) to do exactly what they do.

Suppose Jake eats a cupcake. According to the determinist, antecedent conditions caused him to do this. Hence, he could not have done otherwise unless those antecedent conditions had been different. Given the same conditions, Jake cannot refrain from eating the cupcake. Determinists are content to conclude that freedom is an illusion.

Compatibilism is a version of determinism according to which being determined to do exactly what we do is compatible with freedom as long as the antecedent conditions that determine what we do include our own choices. Compatibilists claim that the choices we make are free even though we could not do otherwise given the same antecedent conditions. On this view, Jake chose to eat the cupcake because his desire for it outweighed all other considerations at that moment. Our choices are always determined by our strongest desires according to compatibilists.

Metaphysical libertarians reject determinism and compatibilism, insisting that free will includes the ability to act against our strongest desires. On this view, Jake could have refrained from eating the cupcake even given the exact same antecedent conditions. While desires influence our choices they do not cause our choices according to metaphysical libertarianism; rather, our choices are caused by our will which is itself an uncaused cause, meaning that it is an independent power, stronger than any antecedent condition. This notion of free will enables the metaphysical libertarian to assign a very strong conception of individual responsibility to human beings: what we do is not attributable to God or nature or environmental factors.

Many people make the assumption that all medieval philosophers were metaphysical libertarians. Whereas Protestant theology classically promotes theological determinism, the view that everything human beings do is foreordained by God, Catholic theology classically promotes the view that God gave human beings free will. While it is true that every medieval philosopher endorses the thesis that human beings are free, few are able to maintain a commitment to free will, defined as the ability to do other than we do given the same antecedent conditions. The reason is that so many other theological and philosophical doctrines conflict with it.

Consider divine foreknowledge. If God is omniscient, then he knows everything that you are ever going to do. Suppose he knows that you will eat an apple for lunch tomorrow. How then is it possible for you to choose not to eat an apple for lunch tomorrow? Even if God does not force you in any way, it seems his present knowledge of your future requires that your choices are already determined.

Medieval philosophers struggle with this and other conflicts with free will. Most give up on metaphysical libertarianism in favor of some form of compatibilism. This is to say they maintain that our choices are free even though they are determined by antecedent conditions.

In his Sentences Commentary, Peter John Olivi makes a long and impassioned argument for an unadulterated metaphysical libertarian conception of free will. Ockham embraces Olivi’s position without ever making much of an argument for it. In Ockham’s view, we experience freedom. We can no more dismiss this experience than we can dismiss our experience of the external world. Ockham goes to great lengths to adjust his account of divine foreknowledge and anything else that might otherwise threaten free will in order to accommodate it. He writes,

The will is freely able to will something and not to will it. By this I mean that it is able to destroy the willing that it has and produce anew a contrary effect, or it is equally able in itself to continue that same effect and not produce a new one. It is able to do all of this without any prior change in the intellect, or in the will, or in something outside them. The idea is that the will is equal for producing and not producing because, with no difference in antecedent conditions, it is able to produce and not to produce. It is poised equally over contrary effects in such a way in fact, that it is able to cause love or hatred of something.... To deny every agent this equal or contrary power is to destroy every praise and blame, every council and deliberation, every freedom of the will. Indeed, without it, the will would not make a human being free any more than appetite does an ass. [Opera Philosophica, pp. 319-21]

Ockham’s reference to an ass here is significant in connection with the famous thought experiment known as Buridan’s Ass.

Jean Buridan was a younger contemporary of Ockham’s. Although he embraced and elaborated Ockham’s nominalism, he openly rejected metaphysical libertarianism, arguing that the human intellect determines the human will. He may have engaged in a public debate with Ockham over the nature of human freedom. At any rate, his name somehow became associated with the following thought experiment.

Imagine a hungry donkey poised between two equally delicious piles of hay. The donkey has reason to eat the hay, but because he caught sight of both piles at the same time, he has no more reason to approach one pile than the other. For lack of any way to break the tie, the donkey starves to death. A human being, in contrast, would never make such an ass of himself. The reason is that, in human beings, the will is not determined by the intellect. Free will is the uniquely human dignity that enables us to break the tie between two equally reasonable options.

The French philosopher Pierre Bale (1647-1706) is the first on record to call this thought experiment “Buridan’s Ass.” Although Buridan mentions the case of a dog poised between food and water, he never discusses the case of the donkey in connection with freedom. It is therefore somewhat of a puzzle why the thought experiment is named after him. Interestingly, Peter John Olivi does discuss the case of the donkey in connection with freedom, and we see Ockham echoing that text here.

So, in the end, Ockham’s ethics is dictated by his empiricism. We experience free will. Therefore, free will is at the core of human nature. Theology tells us that we are made in God’s image. Therefore, free will is at the core of God’s nature. But theology also tells us that God is always good. Therefore, God’s free will must be the objective determinant of goodness.

Setting aside his divine command theory, Ockham’s ethics is rather unremarkable, coming to more or less the same thing as that of his colleagues who reject divine command theory. One might think Ockham takes a long way around the barn just to arrive at yet another conventional account of Christian virtue! But Ockham never minds taking the long way around for the sake of consistency. We see the same unflagging determination in his political theory

8. Political Theory

Although Ockham was summoned to the papal court in Avignon to defend a number of “suspect theses” extracted from his work, largely concerning the sacrament of the altar, he was never found guilty of heresy, and his conflict with the papacy ultimately had nothing to do with the sacrament of the altar. While staying in Avignon, Ockham met Michael Cesena (1270-1342), the Minister General of the Franciscan Order, who was there in protest of the Pope’s recent pronouncements about the Franciscan vow of poverty. Michael asked Ockham to study these pronouncements, whereupon Ockham joined the protest and soon became irretrievably entangled in a political imbroglio. Leaving academia behind for good, he nevertheless marshaled his central philosophical insights into the debate. While Ockham was not allowed to publish his political treatises, they circulated widely underground, indirectly influencing major developments in political thought.

a. Rights

Who would have guessed that at the root of these developments lay the Franciscan vow of poverty? In Matthew 19, Jesus says to a man, “If you wish to be perfect, go, sell all you have, give your money to the poor, and come, and follow me.” The man who was to become St. Francis of Assisi (1182-1226) took these instructions personally. Raised in a wealthy family, St. Francis gave up the worldly life, founding the Order of the Friar Minor, and requiring all its members to take a vow of poverty. From the very beginning there was controversy over what exactly this vow entailed. By the 1320s, various factions had come to the breaking point.

Michael Cesena promoted the “radical” interpretation, according to which Franciscans should not only live simply but also own nothing, not even the robes on their backs. Pope Nicholas III (1210/1220-1280) had sanctioned this interpretation by arranging for the papacy officially to possess everything that the Franciscans used, including the very food they ate. Living in absolute poverty enabled the Franciscans to preach convincingly against avarice, and, much to the chagrin of Pope John XXII (1244-1334), raise questions about the ever-expanding papal palace in Avignon.

John was determined to amass great wealth for the church and the Franciscan vow of poverty was getting in the way. Trained as a lawyer, John worked up a good argument for revoking Nicholas’s arrangement. Given that the Franciscans enjoyed exclusive use of the donations they received, they were the de facto owners. Papal “ownership” of Franciscan property was ownership in name alone.

As a nominalist, however, Ockham was in an excellent position to show why reducing something to a name is not the same as reducing it to nothing at all. A name is a mental concept, and a mental concept is an intention. Ockham set out to show that the intention to use is distinct from the intention to own.

Ockham derives his definition of ownership from metaphysical libertarianism. Ownership is not just a conventional relationship established through social agreement. It is a natural relationship that arises through the act of making something of your own free will. Free will naturally confers ownership because it implies sole responsibility. Suppose you freely make a choice. Since you could have done otherwise, you are the true cause of the result. To own something is to do what you will with it.

The Franciscans do not do as they will with the donations given to them, according to Ockham, but rather as the owner wills. They are therefore merely using the donations and do not own them. Granted, in normal practice, this distinction may be entirely undetectable, because the will of the owner matches that of the user. But if a conflict of wills should arise, the distinction would become readily apparent. Suppose someone donates some cloth to the Order intending it to be used for robes. The friars must use it for robes even if they would rather use it for something else. And if the donor wants the cloth back even after it is made into robes, the friars will have no basis for refusing and no legal recourse. Ockham puts the crucial point in terms of crucial language: the owner retains a right (ius) to what he owns.

The notion of a right is one of the most important features of modern political theory. Its emergence in the history of Western thought is a long and complicated story. Nevertheless, the Franciscan poverty debate is standardly considered an important watershed, in which Ockham played a significant role.

b. Separation of Church and State

Ockham extends his commitment to poverty beyond just the Franciscan order, convinced that wealth is an inappropriate source of power for the Catholic Church as a whole. In his view, the Catholic Church has a spiritual power which sets it apart from the secular world. This conviction leads Ockham to propose the doctrine that was to become the foundation of the United States Constitution: separation of church and state.

Throughout the Middle Ages, popes and emperors vied for supremacy across Europe. The political momentum was split in two directions and it was not at all clear which way things would go. One side pushed for hierocracy, where the pope, as the highest authority, appoints the emperor. The other side pushed for imperialism, where the emperor, as the highest authority, appoints the pope. Often the pushing came to shoving; it seemed there would be no end to the ill will and bloodshed.

Ockham boldly proposes a third alternative: the pope and the emperor should be separate but equal, each supreme in his own domain. This was an outrageous suggestion, unwelcome on both sides. Ockham’s argument for it stems from reflections that foreshadow the “state of nature” thought experiments of premier modern political theorists Thomas Hobbes (1588-1679), John Locke (1632-1704) and Jean-Jacques Rousseau (1712-1778).

In the Garden of Eden, God gave the earth to human beings to use to their common benefit. As long as we were willing to share there was no need for property among us. After the fall, however, human beings became selfish and exploitative. Laws became necessary to restrain immoderate appetite for secular or “temporal” goods and to prevent the neglect of their management. Since laws are useless without the ability to enforce them, we arrived at the need for secular power. The function of the secular power is to punish law breakers and in general coerce everyone into obeying the law.

By renouncing property, the Franciscans were attempting to live as God originally intended. In a perfect world, there would be no need for property and the coercive authority it spawns. All Christians should aspire to this anarchic utopia, even though they may never fully achieve it. In the meanwhile, they should avoid mixing the spiritual and the secular as much as possible. Ockham writes,

For this reason, the head of Christians does not, as a rule, have power to punish secular wrongs with a capital penalty and other bodily penalties and it is for thus punishing such wrongs that temporal power and riches are chiefly necessary; such punishment is granted chiefly to the secular power. The pope therefore, can, as a rule, correct wrongdoers only with a spiritual penalty. It is not, therefore, necessary that he should excel in temporal power or abound in temporal riches, but it is enough that Christians should willingly obey him. [A Letter to the Friars Minor and other Writings, p. 204]

For Ockham, the separation of church and state is a separation of the ideal and the real.

Ockham mentions democracy only in passing, arguing in favor of monarchy as the best form of secular government. Moreover, he finds representational forms of government objectionable on the grounds that there is no such thing as a common will. Ockham is not holding out for a superhuman leader. On the contrary, he seems to think that a fairly ordinary, good man can make a decent king. One wonders if Louis of Bavaria, to whose protection he and Michael fled, inspired this confidence. Perhaps Ockham is content with monarchy because, in his view, the secular world will always be intrinsically flawed. He sets his hopes instead on the spiritual world, and this is why he was so bitterly disappointed in Pope John XXII.

c. Freedom of Speech

Ockham’s battle with the papacy continued after John’s death through two successive popes. Although Ockham never came to criticize the institution of the papacy itself, as would later Protestant thinkers, he did accuse the popes he opposed of heresy and called for their expulsion. Ironically, Ockham’s extensive analysis of the concept of heresy turns into a defense of free speech.

In keeping with his doctrine of the separation of church and state, Ockham maintains that the pope, and only the pope, has the right to level spiritual penalties, and only spiritual penalties, against someone who knowingly asserts theological falsehoods and refuses to be corrected. A man might unknowingly assert a theological falsehood a thousand times, however. As long as he is willing to be corrected, he should not be judged a heretic, especially by the pope.

Ockham’s political treatises are strewn with biblical exegesis, often glaringly ad hoc and sometimes quite interesting, as in the present case. In Matthew 28:20 Jesus promises his disciples: “I will be with you always, to the end of the age.” This text traditionally provided justification for the doctrine of papal infallibility according to which the pope cannot be wrong when speaking about official church matters. Ockham rejects this doctrine, however, arguing that the minimum required for Jesus to keep his promise is that one human being remain faithful at any given time, and this one could be anyone, even a single baptized infant. This implies that the entire institution of the church could become completely corrupt. As a result, any theological claim, no matter how ancient or universally accepted, is always open for dispute.

Even more interesting, however, is Ockham’s view of non-theological speech. He writes that

...purely philosophical assertions which do not pertain to theology should not be solemnly condemned or forbidden by anyone, because in connection with such assertions anyone at all ought to be free to say freely what pleases him, [Dialogus, I.2.22]

This statement long predates the Areopagitica of John Milton (1608-1674), which is typically heralded as the earliest defense of free speech in Western history.

Ockham’s contributions in political thought are less known and appreciated than they may have been if he had been able to publish them. Likewise, there is no telling what he might have accomplished in philosophy if he had been allowed to carry on with his academic career. Ockham was ahead of his time. His role in history was to make way for new ideas, boldly planting seeds that grew and flourished after his death.

9. References and Further Reading

a. Ockham’s Works in Latin

  • William of Ockham, 1967-88. Opera philosophica et theologica. Gedeon Gál, et al., ed. 17 vols. St. Bonaventure, N. Y.: The Franciscan Institute.
  • William of Ockham, 1956-97. Opera politica. H. S. Offler, et al. ed. 4 vols. Vols. 1-3, Manchester: Manchester University Press, 1956-74. Vol. 4, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1997.
  • William of Ockham, 1995-still in progress. Dialogus. John Kilcullen and John Scott, et al. ed. & trans.

b.Ockham’s Works in English Translation

  • Adams, Marilyn McCord, and Norman Kretzmann, trans. 1983. William of Ockham: Predestination, God’s Foreknowledge, and Future Contingents. 2nd ed. Indianapolis: Hackett.
  • Birch, T. Bruce, ed. & trans. 1930. The De sacramento altaris of William of Ockham. Burlington, Iowa: Lutheran Literary Board.
  • Boehner, Philotheus, ed. & trans. 1990. William of Ockham: Philosophical Writings. Rev. ed. Indianapolis, Ind.: Hackett.
  • Davies, Julian, trans. 1989. Ockham on Aristotle’s Physics: A Translation of Ockham’s Brevis Summa Libri Physicorum. St. Bonaventure, N. Y.: The Franciscan Institute.
  • Freddoso, Alfred J., and Francis E. Kelly, trans. 1991. Quodlibetal Questions. New Haven, Conn.: Yale University Press.
  • Freddoso, Alfred J., and Henry Schuurman, trans. 1980. Ockham’s Theory of Propositions: Part II of the Summa logicae. Notre Dame, Ind.: University of Notre Dame Press.
  • Kilcullen, John, and John Scott, ed. & trans. 1995-still in progress. Dialogue on the Power of the Emperor and the Pope.
  • Kluge, Eike-Henner W., trans. 1973-74. “William of Ockham’s Commentary on Porphyry: Introduction and English Translation.” Franciscan Studies 33, pp. 171-254, and 34, pp. 306-82.
  • Loux, Michael J. 1974. Ockham’s Theory of Terms: Part I of the Summa Logicae. Notre Dame, Ind.: University of Notre Dame Press.
  • McGrade, A. S., and John Kilcullen, ed. & trans. 1992. A Short Discourse on the Tyrannical Government over Things Divine and Human. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • McGrade, A. S., and John Kilcullen, ed. & trans. 1995. A Letter to the Friars Minor and Other Writings. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Spade, Paul Vincent, 1994. Five Texts on the Mediaeval Problem of Universals: Porphyry, Boethius, Abelard, Duns Scotus, Ockham. Indianapolis, Ind.: Hackett.
  • Wood, Rega, trans. 1997. Ockham on the Virtues. West Lafayette, Ind.: Purdue University Press.

c. Books about Ockham

  • Adams, Marilyn McCord, 1987. William Ockham. 2 vols., Notre Dame, Ind.: University of Notre Dame Press. (2nd rev. ed., 1989.)
  • Copleston, F.C., 1953. History of Philosophy, Volume III: Ockham to Suarez. London: Search Press.
  • Goddu, André, 1984. The Physics of William of Ockham. Leiden: E. J. Brill.
  • Hirvonen, Vesa, 2004. Passions in William Ockham’s Philosophical Psychology. Dordrecht: Kluwer.
  • Kaye, Sharon M. and Robert Martin, 2001. On Ockham. Belmont: Wadsworth.
  • Maurer, Armand, 1999. The Philosophy of William of Ockham in the Light of its Principles. Toronto: Pontifical Institute of Medieval Studies.
  • McGrade, A. S., 1974. The Political Thought of William of Ockham. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Spade, Paul, ed., 1999. The Cambridge Companion to Ockham. New York: Cambridge University Press.
  • Panaccio, Claude, 2004. Ockham on Concepts. Burlington: Ashgate.
  • Tauchau, Katherine H., 1988. Vision and Certitude in the Age of Ockham: Optics, Epistemology and the Foundations of Semantics, 1250-1345. Leiden: E. J. Brill.

Author Information

Sharon Kaye
John Carroll University
U. S. A.

Richard Rorty (1931—2007)

RortyRichard Rorty was an important American philosopher of the late twentieth and early twenty-first century who blended expertise in philosophy and comparative literature into a perspective called "The New Pragmatism" or “neopragmatism.” Rejecting the Platonist tradition at an early age, Rorty was initially attracted to analytic philosophy. As his views matured he came to believe that this tradition suffered in its own way from representationalism, the fatal flaw he associated with Platonism. Influenced by the writings of Darwin, Gadamer, Hegel and Heidegger, he turned towards Pragmatism.

Rorty’s thinking as a historicist and anti-essentialist found its fullest expression in 1979 in his most noted book, Philosophy and the Mirror of Nature. Abandoning all claims to a privileged mental power that allows direct access to things-in-themselves, he offered an alternative narrative which adapts Darwinian evolutionary principles to the philosophy of language. The result was an attempt to establish a thoroughly naturalistic approach to issues of science and objectivity, to the mind-body problem, and to concerns about the nature of truth and meaning. In Rorty’s view, language is to be employed as an adaptive tool used to cope with the natural and social environments to achieve a desired, pragmatic end.

Motivating his entire program is Rorty’s challenge to the notion of a mind-independent, language-independent reality that scientists, philosophers, and theologians appeal to when professing their understanding of the truth. This greatly influences his political views. Borrowing from Dewey’s writings on democracy, especially where he promotes philosophy as the art of the politically useful leading to policies that are best, Rorty ties theoretical inventiveness to pragmatic hope. In place of traditional concerns about whether what one believes is well-grounded, Rorty, in Philosophy and Social Hope (1999), advises that it is better to focus on whether one has been imaginative enough to develop interesting alternatives to one’s present beliefs. His assumption is that in a foundationless world, creative, secular humanism must replace the quest for an external authority (God, Nature, Method, and so forth) to provide hope for a better future. He characterizes that future as being free from dogmatically authoritarian assertions about truth and goodness. Thus, Rorty sees his New Pragmatism as the legitimate next step in completing the Enlightenment project of demystifying human life, by ridding humanity of the constricting "ontotheological" metaphors of past traditions, and thereby replacing the power relations of control and subjugation inherent in these metaphors with descriptions of relations based on tolerance and freedom.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Thoughts and Work
  3. Major Influences
    1. Hegel’s Historicism as Protopragmatism
    2. Darwin’s Evolution
    3. Heidegger: Contingency over Certainty
    4. Dewey’s Pragmatic Democracy
    5. Davidson on Truth and Meaning
  4. Positions
    1. Overview
    2. Philosophy: Neither Realism nor Antirealism
    3. Anti-essential Nominalism
    4. Anti-foundationalist Historicism
    5. Ethnocentricism
    6. Philosophy as Metaphor
    7. Anti-representational Metaphilosophy
    8. Pragmatic Pluralism
    9. Solidarities, Poets, and the Jeffersonian Strategy
    10. Non-reductive Materialism and the Self
  5. Critics
    1. Hilary Putnam, John McDowell, and James Conant
    2. Donald Davidson and Bjorn Ramberg
    3. Daniel Dennett
    4. Jurgen Habermas, Nancy Fraser, and Norman Geras
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. a. Works by Rorty
    2. b. Works about Rorty
    3. c. Further Reading

1. Life

Richard McKay Rorty was born on October 4, 1931 in New York City. He held teaching positions at Yale University from 1954 to 1956, Wellesley College from 1958 to 1961, Princeton University from 1961 to 1982, and the University of Virginia since 1982. In addition he has held many visiting positions.

As he relates in his autobiographical piece, "Trotsky and the Wild Orchids," Rorty’s early and informal education began with the books in his parents' library, particularly Leon Trotsky’s two books History of the Russian Revolution and Literature and Revolution as well as two volumes on the Dewey Commission of Inquiry into the Moscow Trials. These materials, along with his family’s association with noted socialists such as John Frank and Carlo Tresca, introduced Rorty to the plight of oppressed peoples and the fight for social justice.

At the age of fifteen in 1946, Rorty entered the University of Chicago where he eventually earned B.A. and M.A. degrees. After initially embracing Platonism and its replacement of passion by reason as a method to harmonize reality with the ideals of justice, a reluctant Rorty came to hold that this rapprochement was impossible. Opting rather for the rigors of the study of the philosophy of mind and analytic philosophy, Rorty left Chicago for Yale University, where he received his Ph.D. degree in 1956. He developed the theory of eliminativism materialism in "Mind-body Identity, Privacy and Categories" (1965), The Linguistic Turn (1967) and "In Defense of Eliminative Materialism" (1970). Here he clarifies and adjusts his commitment to the analytic tradition, a commitment that began with his Ph.D. dissertation “The Concept of Potentiality.” He eventually was to become disenchanted with analytic philosophy.

After reading Hegel’s Phenomenology of the Spirit, Rorty began to appreciate the degree to which the incessant conflict of philosophers and their competing first principles might, with the cunning of reason, be transformed from a seemingly interminable debate into a conversation that weaves itself into a “conceptual fabric of a freer, better, more just society.” This appreciation matured with Rorty’s study of Heidegger’s works.

During his tenure at Princeton University, Rorty was reintroduced to the works of John Dewey that he had set aside for his studies on Plato. It was this reacquaintance with Dewey, along with an acquaintance with the writings of Wilfrid Sellars and W. V. Quine that caused Rorty to redirect his interest to the study and development of the American philosophy of Pragmatism.

The publication of his first book, Philosophy and the Mirror of Nature in 1979, the same year he became President of the American Philosophical Association, publicly marked Rorty’s thorough break with Platonic essentialism as well as with Cartesian foundationalism. He attacked assumptions at the core of modern epistemology—the conceptions of mind, of knowledge and of the discipline of philosophy.

Calling himself “raucously secularist,” Rorty rejected contemporary attempts at holding justice and reality in a single vision, declaring this to be a remnant of what Heidegger called the ontotheological tradition whose metaphors had frozen into dogmatic truisms about truth and goodness. In Contingency, Irony and Solidarity (1989), Rorty extended this claim by abandoning all pretenses to an analytic style. Opting for a Proust-inspired narrative approach where arguments for universal rights, common humanity, and justice are replaced with references to pain and humiliation as motivation for society to form solidarities (contingent groupings of like-minded individuals) in opposition to suffering, Rorty substituted hope for knowledge as the main thrust of his efforts. Tolerant conversations rather than philosophical debates and idiosyncratic re-creation rather than self-discovery have been hallmarks of his pragmatic pursuit for social hope, the pursuit of which can be characterized as a historicist quest for human happiness that abandons a search for universal truth and timeless goodness in favor of what works. Rorty’s pragmatic aim was and continues to be the development of a liberal society where there is freedom from pain and humiliation and where open-mindedness is practiced.

More recently, Rorty developed his notion of the uses of philosophy by using as his template a reading of Darwinian evolution applied to Deweyan democratic principles. This development appears most notably in Achieving Our Country (1998), Truth and Progress: Philosophical Papers III (1998) and in Philosophy and Social Hope (1999). Rorty died on June 8, 2007.

2. Thoughts and Work

The failure of Rorty’s youthful attempt to synthesize into one vision his identification with the downtrodden together with his search for the "Truth beyond hypothesis" was the making of his career in philosophy. As early as 1967, Rorty had moved away from an initial interest in linguistic philosophy as a way of finding a neutral standpoint from which to establish a strict science of language, and he began his shift to pragmatism. With the publication of Philosophy and the Mirror of Nature (1979), Rorty further elucidated his maturing anti-essentialist, historicist positions as applied to topics such as the philosophy of science and the mind-body problem, as well as the philosophy of language as it pertained to issues of truth and meaning. With Consequences of Pragmatism (1982), Rorty developed in greater detail the themes covered in his 1979 work.

With Contingency, Irony and Solidarity (1989), Rorty first implicitly linked his rejection of philosophical appeals to ahistorical universals with that of his pragmatist narrative, a narrative of free, idiosyncratic individuals who, inspired by intuitions and sensibilities captured in great works of literature, commit themselves to contingent solidarities devoted to social and political liberalism. Furthermore, these individuals, detached from the need to justify their world-view by an appeal to the way the world is, would see moral obligation as a matter of social conditioning by cultural forces, which are in turn structured by the prevalent human needs and desires of a specific era.

In Part III of Objectivity, Relativism and Truth (1991), Rorty continued to develop his pragmatist views on politics in a democratic society. In Parts I and II he set his sights on contemporary ideas about objectivity, using the writings of Donald Davidson and others for support in debunking the claim that the human mind is capable of discovering ahistorical truth concerning the nature and meaning of reality from a “God’s-eye,” ideal perspective. Supporting the entire work is Rorty’s challenge to the notion of a mind-independent, language-independent reality to which scientists, philosophers, and politicians appeal when professing that they have a corner on the truth. His Essays on Heidegger and Others (1991) is devoted to harmonizing the works of Heidegger and Derrida with the writings of Dewey and Davidson, particularly in their anti-representational insights and stances on contingent historicism.

Later writings, such as Truth and Progress (1998); Achieving our Country: Leftist Thoughts in Twentieth-Century America (1998); and Philosophy and Social Hope (1999), clarify his anti-essentialist stance by integrating a neo-Darwinian perspective into a Dewey-inspired pragmatism.

3. Major Influences

Although the writing of any philosopher will have countless influences, there are generally only a handful which stand out as major inspirations. Rorty is no exception. While Nietzsche, Wittgenstein, Derrida, James, Quine, and Kuhn contribute much to his worldview, of central importance to Rorty’s narrative of New Pragmatism are five influential thinkers: G. W. F. Hegel, Charles Darwin, Martin Heidegger, John Dewey, and Donald Davidson, each contributing a significant layer to Rorty’s complex take on questions central to contemporary philosophy.

a. Hegel’s Historicism as Protopragmatism

It was G. W. F. Hegel’s willingness in his Phenomenology of the Spirit (1977) to abandon certainty and eternity as philosophical and moral goals/ideals that inspired Rorty to appreciate the irreducible temporality of everything as well as to understand philosophy as a contingent narrative readable without a moral precept existing behind the storyline. Calling Hegel’s switch from the metaphor of individual salvation through contact with a transcendental reality to salvation through the achievement of the completion of an historical process “protopragmatism,” Rorty asserts that this move was a critical step forward in human thinking, taking us from the notion of how things were meant to be to a perspective on how things never were but might be. The change of focus from epistemological stasis, the adequate discernment of God’s Will or Nature’s Way, to interpretive processes opened the way for subsequent intellectuals to envision their task as that of constructing a better future rather than the discovery and conforming to a static idea of the Good Life. The refocused purpose of philosophy, from Rorty’s perspective, would be best captured by Hegel’s phrase “time held in thought,” that is, a narrative of a community’s progress across time that can be described in terms of its current and parochial needs; societal growth not measured against some non-human, eternal standard. Thus, Rorty contends, Hegel helped us to begin to substitute pragmatic hope for apodictic knowledge.

Of course, Hegel saw his own philosophical efforts as elucidating the progression by which the rational becomes real. That is, he conceived history as the process of the Absolute becoming increasingly self-manifest (the Incarnate Logos) through the development toward, and concrete realization in, the human consciousness. This Rorty rejects as a form of pantheistic fantasy that attempts to maintain a “closeness of fit” between word and world by rendering humanity as the mere manifestation of the Divine Mind, and one that is not consistent, ironically, with Hegel’s own anti-representational doctrine of historicism. To address this inconsistency and for a corrective to Hegel’s Absolute Idealism, Rorty turns to Charles Darwin.

b. Darwin’s Evolution

In 1998 Rorty contended that Darwin has demonstrated how to naturalize Hegel by the former’s dispensing with claims that the real is rational while allowing for a narrative of change understood as an endless series of progressive unfolding. Purpose that transcends a given organism is eliminated in favor of a particular organism’s fitness for the local environment. It is an evolutionary process, one that fully involves human beings; we are no exception. What we, as creatures of the earth, do and are, Rorty maintains, “is continuous with what amoebas, spiders, and squirrels do and are.” Consciousness and thought are not distinct kinds; they are inextricably linked to the use of language. Language is the practice of using long and complex strings of noises and marks to successfully adapt to one’s environment. If language is at all a break in the continuity between other species and humans, it is only insofar as it is a tool that humans have at their disposal, which amoebas, squirrels, and the like do not. Nevertheless, just as other species have developed the tools of night-hunting, migration and hibernation to adapt to environmental change, we have used language as a tool for our survival. Thus, for Rorty, language is not a mysterious add-on over and above human creaturehood, but part of our “animality,” as he puts it. As a conveyer of meaning, language should be understood as the use of sentences to achieve a practical goal through a cooperative effort. It is “the ability to have and ascribe sentential attitudes” that contributes to our species’ successful survival in a world of dynamic possibilities. In this way, borrowing from Darwin, Rorty naturalizes language.

Darwin also has made materialism respectable to an educated public once, according to Rorty (Truth and Progress, 1998), his “vitalism” is dismissed. Darwin’s detailed account of the way in which both life and consciousness might have evolved from non-living, non-conscious chemical soup gave plausibility to their emergence free from teleology. Taking the new-found respectability of materialism along with the recognition of the human species’ full-fledged animality, the search for a non-natural cause for the prolific display of life on earth can be dispensed with as misguided. So too can a hunt for a non-human purpose for human life. “After Darwin,” Rorty asserts, “it became possible to believe that nature is not leading up to anything—that nature has nothing in mind.”

Without transcendent standards or intrinsic ends to aspire to, we humans find ourselves radically free to invent the purpose of human life and the means to achieve it. Rorty, well aware of the need for a consistent anti-representationalist narrative, acknowledges that even Darwin’s theory of evolutionary change is just one more image of the way things “are,” one no more privileged than any other coherent narrative in representing reality in-itself—an impossible task. In fact Rorty suggests that the main, albeit unintended, contribution of Darwin is the de-mythologizing of the human self (considered as part of an unnarrated, objective reality). Rorty argues that we should “read Darwin not as offering one more theory about what we really are but as providing reasons why we do not need to ask what we really are.” Old habits of deferentially attributing to an immaterial spirit or to nature’s intrinsic life-force (for example, élan vital) the power to determine the structure, meaning of, and means to our existence ought to be set aside as outmoded and replaced by a story of dynamic cultural innovation and humanistic pluralism. This is the pragmatic vocabulary that Rorty envisions Darwin preparing with his notion of evolutionary change, a vocabulary that is further molded by the writings of Martin Heidegger.

c. Heidegger: Contingency over Certainty

Martin Heidegger influenced Rorty in the direction of process over permanence. Labeling the history of Western metaphysics “the ontotheological tradition,” Heidegger postulated that an underlying assumption persisted from Plato down to the positivists: the power relation of “the stronger overcoming the weaker.” Rorty (in “Heidegger, Contingency, and Pragmatism,” 1991) notes that Heidegger finds that thinkers as diverse as Aristotle, St. Paul, Descartes, and Hegel assume this sort of asymmetrical power relation in the process of searching for the truth that overcomes ignorance, tames sensual desire by reason, or defeats sin with the aid of God’s grace. Each thinker in his own fashion seeks a force that overwhelms the subject as it makes its project evident. By doing so, the individual ceases to create and live his own projects in deference to the presence of the stronger influence. The submission to this influence would be both a concession to a power greater than oneself and identification with it. And it is in this identification, Heidegger claimed, that a subtle shift from an attitude of subservience to one of control and domination occurs within the seeker.

Rorty agrees with Heidegger that the “quest for certainty, clarity, and direction from outside can also be viewed as an attempt to escape from time, to view Sein as something that has little to do with Zeit.” For the ontotheological tradition, time, in its fleeting manifestations, receives the unfavorable comparison with the reality of the eternal. Thus the unspoken goal of the metaphysically-inclined advocates of this philosophical tradition is to be free from the contingency, the uncertainty, and the fragility of the human condition by a release into and identification with the eternal. Valuing power above fragility, propositions over words, truth to metaphor, philosophy above poetry, in the hands of pre-Heideggerian philosophers the use of language becomes merely a means in the pursuit of a reality and a force which rises above the signifier.

Heidegger rejected this family of philosophical thinking along with its “quest for disinterested theoretical truth” as an over-intellectualized escape from the human condition. It is at its core inauthentic. The will to truth of the metaphysician is actually the poetic urge in disguise. Since antiquity, the ontotheological tradition is the attempt by (poetic) thinkers to deploy a series of metaphors to break away from the contingency of poetic metaphor. More than hypocritical, in Heidegger eyes, the ontotheologian exhibits hubris in his belief that Western philosophy is capable of getting it right and be clear about what is real, rather than appreciating his attempt as just one of many practices trying to give voice to the “reality” of Being. Instead Heidegger urged that an amalgamation of beliefs and desires had to be made in order to recover and reassert the “force of words” heard as when they were first spoken—original and potent—in order to open a space for Being.

Rorty understands Heidegger to be saying that there are just we humans and the power of the words we happen to speak. There is no designer, no controller, and no choreographer of human projects, only ourselves and the languages we create. “We are nothing save the words we use.” Thus the poet, in dealing forthrightly with the contingency and historicity of words is an authentic coiner of metaphor. And metaphor is what discloses Being, just as Being is formed and manifested in metaphor. As Rorty writes in “Heidegger, Contingency, and Pragmatism,” “As long as an understanding of Being is ontically possible ‘is there’ Being.”

The use of the term “Being” by Heidegger is, for Rorty, somewhat problematic. With Heidegger, Rorty agrees that there is no hidden power called Being. Rorty interprets Heidegger’s Being as what “final vocabularies” are about. When he declares that “Being’s poem is the poem of Being,” Rorty is not claiming that there is a work of reality that Being “writes”; rather he means that there is no meta-vocabulary to distinguish the adequacy of one final vocabulary above others. Nor is there any non-linguistic, pre-cognitive access to an already present Being that underscores some narrative as preferred. There is no way to escape the contingencies of language to get at Being-in-itself. We are all enmeshed in final vocabularies that present Being in diverse and incommensurate ways. No understanding of Being is better than any other understanding. Heidegger thus cleared the way for Rorty’s dismissal of the realism-antirealism debate and his gloss of Western tradition as the development of pragmatic practices designed to cope with contemporary conditions while remaining open to future descriptions.

Nevertheless, for Heidegger the evolving pattern of power relations that has been the history of Western metaphysics culminates in the “technical,” pragmatic interpretation of thinking. Rorty obviously must differ with Heidegger in the latter’s rejection of pragmatism as the concluding, and unfortunate, outcome of the ontotheological tradition. In “Heidegger, Contingency, and Pragmatism,” Rorty suggests that if Heidegger had only to choose between pragmatism and Platonism, pragmatism would be his choice, fully aware of Heidegger’s distain for pragmatism and his offering of a third option: authentic Dasein’s primal understanding of Being. Yet Rorty maintains that he opts for the early Heidegger’s construal of the “analytic of Dasein” as an interpretation of the Western world-view rather than the later Heidegger’s reading of it as “an account of the ahistorical conditions for the occurrence of history.” In doing so Rorty dismisses all suggestions by Heidegger that some historically embedded language-users’ understanding of Being (for example, the ancient Greeks’) can be more open to (less forgetful of) Being than any subsequent appreciation due to their status as “primordial” inventors of the Western tradition’s metaphors. Yet Rorty also insists that it is impossible to rank understandings because no descriptive account can better help us get behind that which is poetically construed. There is no validating reality behind our narrative; Being and interpretive narrative arise together. Therefore, Rorty appropriates for pragmatism only Heidegger’s sense of contingency and the transitory condition of human life, along with the ability to radically redescribe Western culture. He sets aside Heidegger’s nostalgia for an authentic world-view that says something neutral about the structure of all present and possible world-views. By doing so, Rorty aligns himself more with John Dewey’s brand of anti-essentialism and anti-foundationalism than with Heidegger’s project. For Dewey’s vision of a democratic utopia includes “technical,” pragmatic thinking that is put in service to social practice for the purpose of achieving the integration of inquiry and poetry, theory and practice.

d. Dewey’s Pragmatic Democracy

As with Hegel and Darwin, Rorty intentionally “misreads” or “redescribes” John Dewey from a late-Twentieth-century pragmatist’s perspective. This “hypothetical Dewey” is shorn of what Rorty considers to be dead metaphors in the former’s philosophy (that is his “scientistic” empirical rhetoric and panpsychic notion of experience). Conversely for Rorty, a continuing live option in Dewey’s thought is his naturalism and pragmatism. Seen in this light, Rorty’s Dewey becomes the synthesis of historicism and the expediency of evolutionary adaptation. Most notably, Dewey manifested this fusion in his rejection of the “crust of convention” born of a tradition that took language as representational of reality rather than as instrumental in satisfying a society’s shared beliefs and hopes. The fading conviction originating with Plato that language can adequately represent what there is in words opens the way for a pragmatic utilization of language as a means to address current needs through practical deliberations among thoughtful people.

This view of language is critical for Rorty. With the shift in attitude away from the expectation, on one hand, that through narrative a revelation of moral perfection may become manifest, or, on the other, that through the clear and methodical use of language epistemic certainty may be achieved, humanity is freed to view morality and science as being evolving processes, where means lead to ends and those ends in turn become means toward future aims. Rorty characterizes this, Dewey’s means-ends continuum, as the claim that we change our ideas of what is true, right and good on the basis of the particular blend of success and failure produced by our prior labors to fulfill our hopes. Rorty writes that philosophers such as Dewey “have kept alive the historicist sense that this century’s ‘superstition’ was the last century’s triumph of reason and the relativist sense that the latest vocabulary, borrowed from the latest scientific achievement, may not express privileged representations of essences, but be just another of the potential infinity of vocabularies in which the world can be described.”

In rejecting representationalism and the essentialism that it implies, Dewey abandons the Cartesian-inspired spectator account of knowledge, which radically separates the knowing subject from the object being studied. No longer considering that objectivity a result of a detachment from the material under study but rather as an ongoing interaction with that which is at hand, Dewey elevates practice over theory; better said, he puts theory in service to practice. From Rorty’s perspective, while Dewey had a great insight, he ought to have taken the next step and rejected scientism—the claim that scientific method allows humanity to gain a privileged insight into the structural processes of nature. His failure to reject the alleged epistemologically privileged stance is one main reason Rorty must re-imagine Dewey. Nevertheless, Dewey’s elevation of practice continues the movement away from the pre-Darwinian attachment to the belief in a non-human source of purpose and the immutability of natural kinds toward a contingent “world,” where humans define and redefine their social and material environments. It is within a social practice or a “language-game” that specific marks and sounds come to designate commonly accepted meanings. And, as Rorty states in “Feminism and Pragmatism,” (1995) no set of marks or sounds (memes) can ever bring cognitive clarity about the way the world is or the way we as humans are. Instead, memes compete with one another in an evolutionary struggle over cultural space, just as genes compete for survival in the natural environment. Unguided by an immanent or transcendent teleology, the memes’ replication is determined by their usefulness within a given social group. And it is through their utility for the continued existence and prospering of a social group that the group’s memes—like their genes—are carried forward and flourish. They establish their niche in the socio-ecological system.

By the linkage of meme selection with Darwinian natural selection, Rorty can reasonably say that “the history of social practices is continuous with the history of biological evolution.” He adds a crucial caveat: memes gradually usurp the role of genes. Thus the driving force in human existence becomes the socio-linguistic. And as in the process of natural selection there is no social practice that is privileged and final; no one cultural “species” is intrinsically favored over another. It follows that, as Dewey has said “The worse or evil is a rejected good.” Before deliberation and choice there can be no intrinsic good, no God’s-Eye clarity as to what the true, the right and the just are. All options are competing goods. It is only with the triumph of one set of memes over another by means of manipulation, coercion or force that the determination of a society’s memes as the good (or the bad) of the situation can be asserted. Rorty recognizes that the Deweyan approach, which denies that knowledge is the stable grasping of an independent reality and which asserts “reality” to be a term of value, may lead to the charge of relativism and power-worship. But he believes that the benefits for a democratic society where there is an unfettered competition of ideas outweigh the downside of his anti-universalist stance. Therefore, given the historicist belief that there is no viable alternative to being immersed within the contemporary understanding of one’s time, place and culture, then to abandon the memes with which one chooses to be identified—together with the solidarity one has formed with like-minded others around those memes—would be an absurd denial of one’s self and one’s beliefs. (This is the basis of Rorty’s ethnocentricism.)

Rorty wishes to promote consciously a democracy of plurality and hope rather than one where either private autonomy or communal solidarity dominates. This sentiment can be found most clearly beginning with Contingency, Irony and Solidarity (1989), culminating in Philosophy and Social Hope (1999). By developing an evolutionary sense of history through Dewey’s writings Rorty associates a generalized Darwinism directly with democracy. Growth, or the flourishing of ideas in a political environment that is conducive to the flowering of ideas and practices, is the hope for the future. While there is no metaphysical grounding of this hope in the essence of humanity or in the structure of the world, Rorty maintains that a future where we may continue to be astounded by the latest creative endeavors is a future where human happiness has the best chance.

This democratic trope is acceptable to Rorty because he agrees with Dewey that the essentialist-foundationalist worldview was a product of Europe’s inegalitarian past. The conservative, leisure-class’s desire to maintain the status quo was incorporated into a philosophy that favored eternal necessities over the temporal contingencies and the uncovering of static natures over the engagement with the dynamic processes. As such it stood in the way of growth and constructive change. By shifting attention away from traditional memes to those that focuses on the future, Dewey meant to reconstruct philosophy into the exercise of practical judgment, a dedication to the kinds of understanding that are geared to contemporary obstacles that obstruct the flow of expressive creativity. Rorty endorses Dewey’s intention.

As Rorty characterizes Dewey’s vision, Pragmatism would, for the first time, “put the intellectuals at the service of the productive class rather than the leisure class.” Theory is to be treated as an aid to practice, rather than practice being seen as defective theory. With the assent of practice, the distinctions characteristic of dualism, those between mind and matter, thought and action, and appearance and reality, blur and fall away. Following precisely on this notion is political egalitarianism. If there is not to be dualistic distinction in the abstract, then none should be manifested in practice. Rorty accepts that individual self-reliance ought to be exercised on a communal level. Dewey promotes philosophy as the art of the politically useful. His is a social democracy where the policies that bring social utility are the policies that are best. This is where theoretical creativity ties into Rortyan pragmatic hope: “that one should stop worrying about whether what one believes is well-grounded and start worrying about whether one has been imaginative enough to think up interesting alternatives to one’s present beliefs.” Rorty holds that this is uniquely possible for all citizens in a democratic environment, where the clash of memes can happen under an auspicious tolerance that suppresses to a minimum pain and humiliation and allow for a flourishing of diversity. This is where pragmatism fuses with utilitarian values. Rorty suggests that it is reasonable to offer persuasive rhetoric rather than the use of physical assault or its preludes of mockery and insult, because coming to terms with people will likely increase human happiness in the long run. That is, by keeping open the lines of communication, new and exciting projects for the betterment of our condition has the best chance to develop than if fear and intimidation are the norm. It is the establishment of conditions conducive for human happiness that is the utopian hope within the human heart.

e. Davidson on Truth and Meaning

Rorty had claimed (prior to Ramberg’s essay—see section 5b below) that there was no more of a gap between human psychology and biology than between biology and chemistry (“McDowell, Davidson, and Spontaneity”, 1998). This follows easily from his Deweyan take on Darwinism. Once we accept Dewey’s pragmatism, then the vocabularies that allegedly could distinguish between the human and the natural come under serious challenge. Different disciplines are founded to achieve different purposes. There is no way for a discipline to try to be more “adequate to the world” than any other when, with Rorty, one gives up on, say, Quine’s physicalism which ranks some vocabulary (physics) as ontologically superior to others. If we generalize this rejection, as Rorty does, then one is able to reject scientism, a position which holds that a descriptive practice’s success or failure depends on its capture of a determinative material reality. Once we abandon the idea that one vocabulary is best suited to express the intrinsic order of things, then the ability to express the truth through the use of one vocabulary but not another is due to the different focus of interest that each vocabulary has, and not because one excels beyond all others in the expression of facts. There is a flat, deontologized, playing field among different descriptive strategies. These strategies are tools in the pragmatist’s toolbox to be utilized under appropriate conditions of need-fulfillment. So, for instance, if psychology is rightly conceived as a different practice than, say, economics, it is a practice that is geared to achieve a particular outcome deemed as important by the discipline of psychology, but not necessarily to economics, or for that matter, physics, ethics, and so forth. Psychology is merely a different causal strategy which an individual may choose to engage “nature” to achieve a specific outcome. But no strategy can claim to have the unique language-strategy that gets things right. Rorty believes there is no “super-language” that achieves a more adequate description of our relation to something other than ourselves because all vocabularies merely describe our practices as we engage in a causal interaction with “reality” as understood through those practices.

This position is available to Rorty largely due to Donald Davidson’s argument against the content-scheme distinction. This distinction, common in all dualisms, is seen as necessary only when credence is given to there being disparate ontological realms—one containing beliefs, the other containing non-beliefs (for example, matters of fact). Truth then becomes the correct analysis of the non-causal relation between particular beliefs and specific non-beliefs. But Davidson argues that such a dichotomy lacks credibility. That there is a mysterious relation between human and the non-human which tertia such as “experience,” “sensory stimulation,” “the world,” and so forth, act as epistemological bridges is, according to Davidson, an illusion created by the endeavor to take language as a medium or an instrument used to define truth. Rorty explains that Davidson avoids this representationalist pitfall by understanding “true” in terms of one’s own linguistic know-how. The “language I know,” the way that one’s community copes with the environment in practice, is enough to erase the alleged schism between intentional objects (the objects that most of the rules of action of one’s—or some other—linguistic community are true of; that is, are good for dealing with) and their referents. This is Davidson’s “Principle of Charity.”

The central understanding that Rorty draws from Davidson’s notion of “radical translation” at the heart of the “Principle of Charity” is that we language-users have already the causal link established between our beliefs and their referent(s). There is no need to establish a connection, it is the human condition. This linkage allows us to get things for the most part correct and thus make most of our statements about the world true, and to recognize that any translation is a faulty translation which renders as wrong most of a speaker’s beliefs about the world. Rorty suggests that it follows that any wholesale gap between intentional objects and referents would be impossible since survival depended upon humanity’s pragmatic application of beliefs to the environment. This carries over to our own individual webs of belief. Most of anyone’s beliefs must be, on the whole, true. Rorty uses this insight to explain that though we cannot get outside our beliefs and our language to establish some test besides the coherence of our own or others’ webs of belief we can still speak objectively and have knowledge of a public world not of our personal design.

It is through a Davidsonian holistic view of language that Rorty, contra Davidson, takes “truth” as a misguided slide back into representationalism. For Davidson, truth is a transparent term that in itself does not explain anything but emerges when the rules for action causally interact successfully with the world. Rorty rejects all appeals to truth, Davidsonian or otherwise, in favor of social justification. Because there are no comprehensive barriers between oneself and the world, we are free to advance beliefs with the aim of persuading others as to their efficacy in obtaining the outcomes they most desire. This is how Rorty blends Davidson’s notion of radical translation with Dewey’s naturalism to yield Rorty’s neopragmatism.

4. Positions

a. Overview

The overarching theme of Rorty’s writing is a promotion of a thorough-going naturalism. Recognizing the value of the Enlightenment challenge to religious speculation, and its offering of a humanist philosophy in its place, Rorty argues that the Enlightenment program was never completed. It fell short of its goal by keeping one foot in the past. By substituting the notion of Truth as One in place of a monotheistic worldview, the Enlightenment reformers repeated the tradition’s error by continuing to seek non-human authority, now in the guise of what Wilfrid Sellers called “the Myth of the Given.” Holding that reality has an intrinsic nature, and by advancing the correspondence theory of truth, Enlightenment philosophers turned away from full-blown naturalism, ironically, in service to a scientific objectivity that required a radical separation of the observer from the observed. Rorty’s neopragmatism is meant to ameliorate this perceived shortcoming by rigorously following through on Immanuel Kant’s distinction between causality and justification.

Rorty holds that our relation with the environment is purely causal. However, the way in which we describe it—the linguistic tools we employ to cope with the recalcitrance of that environment in an effort to achieve our purposes and desires, as natural creatures in the natural world—determines how we understand that world. Once we are causally prompted to form a belief, justification may take place in a social world where, as Davidson notes, only a belief can justify a belief. In short, Rorty maintains that there can be no norms derived from the natural, but only from the social.

This position allows Rorty to reject scientism (the representationalist view that cleaves to the Myth of the Given) while endorsing the development of a fully-naturalized science as an extremely useful tool for prediction and control. It also opens the way for Rorty to advance naturalized democracy with confidence. Instead of seeking some underlying fact about human nature which is essential, ahistorical, and universalizable, Rorty proposes we seek the justifications that are relevant to a contextually embedded practice. The loss of the unconditionality associated with long-established notions of truth is actually a gain, pragmatically speaking. While truth is an aim that is unachievable due to its definitional ambivalence prior to commitment to action, justification is a recognizable (and contingent) goal that permits practical satisfaction without closing the door on future recalibrations in response to inevitable challenges to such justifications. The best way to allow for justification of a belief with no neutral standpoint, Rorty suggests, is to allow competing beliefs to be evaluated on their performance capabilities and not on their ability to ground themselves in universal validity. This leads directly to Rorty’s ethnocentricism.

The following are various positions Rorty takes in accordance with his project of New Pragmatism.

b. Philosophy: Neither Realism nor Antirealism

For Rorty one of the results of the merging of Dewey’s naturalism with Davidson’s view of truth is the dropping of the realist-anti-realist issue. One is always in touch with reality as a language user, thus the distinction between truth-conditions and assertibility-conditions dissolves. However, it is important to note that although we humans use language to engage the environment it does not make the process artificial, in the sense of language concealing a transcendent reality behind social constructs, or by its being in wholesale error concerning the inherent character of the natural world. Rorty writes in Objectivity, Relativism, and Truth (1991) that “Davidson, on my interpretation, thinks that the benefit of going ‘linguistic’ is that getting rid of the Cartesian mind is the first step toward eliminating the tertia which, by seeming to intrude between us and the world, created the old metaphysical issues in the first place.” He continues that once we dispense with the tertia that try to breach the now discredited scheme-content gap, the distinction between appearance (“useful fictions”) and reality (“objective facts”) disappears. What remain are one’s community practices unfolding in a seamless and endless process of reweaving webs of beliefs in response to current and future conditions. From his rejection of the realist-anti-realist distinction springs Rorty’s anti-essentialist nominalism and anti-foundationalism.

c. Anti-essential Nominalism

Related to Rorty’s rejection of what he characterizes as the false dichotomy between realism and antirealism, is his dismissal of all ideas of essentialism. The Neurath’s Boat thought experiment poses no problem for Rorty. Terms like “boat” or “self” are strictly linguistic in nature. That is, they do not refer to Platonic Forms or Aristotelian essences, but to linguistically constructed, intentional objects. Boats or selves may undergo complete change piece-by-piece and still maintain their identity if and only if there is social agreement about the continuance of such notions. What is radical in Rorty’s linguistic principle is that there is no ultimate difference between the human and the non-human “entities;” they are definable and redefinable “all the way down.” There is nothing standing under [sub-stance] or above to anchor the ever-evolving linguistic parsing of metaphors.

Similarly, reference to reflexive consciousness, the hallmark of unique and private Cartesian self distinct from all non-conscious objects is, for Rorty an illegitimate attempt to nest metaphysical assertions about the existence of a separate human mind in the epistemology of first-person, self-evident awareness. Equally illegitimate is the appeal to materialism common to scientism. Language that reduces consciousness to brain functions creates a vocabulary that attempts to explain mental events as happenings of material alteration. There is a metaphysical assumption in materialism that Rorty, as an anti-essentialist, cannot countenance: that there is a physical world that is “really there” adequate to the cause of the mental.

Neither a reductive materialist nor dualistic subjectivist, Rorty opts for nominalist-pragmatism. That materialists deal with reality is to be understood as their concentrating on the concepts and descriptors they find most useful to discuss. When dualists maintain that there is an awareness which stands distinct from that which is extended and non-conscious, it shows their stubborn commitment to the dead Cartesian metaphor. Descartes’ reconstruction of the world was designed to secure the study of physics in a religious environment hostile to its practice. To reify Descartes’ “mind as a mental eye” metaphor as that which “perceives” itself as a self-evident “given” is to misunderstand the application of language to personal experience. This is a major theme of Rorty’s Philosophy as the Mirror of Nature (1979), as captured in his “Antipodean Analogy.” It is a challenge and reminder to the reader that the way we speak about the mental can (and will at some future time) be radically reconceived. If there can be found nothing essential to the mental that extends beyond and grounds our description of it, the very process with which we seem most intimate, then it follows that there is nothing essential—non-linguistic—to the non-mental either. There is no essential constitution to our minds. Rorty declares that privacy, immediacy, introspectibility, intentionality, incorrigibility, and self-evidency can be redescribed in terms that do not involve subjectivism (see also “Dennett on Awareness”).

d. Anti-foundationalist Historicism

Rorty denies the utility of all foundational philosophies (for example, Cartesian clear and distinct ideas, Kantian a priori truths, and so forth) on the basis that they share with representationalism a belief that the mind is the “mirror of nature.” Once the metaphysical distinction between appearance and reality disappears, so too ought the need for a knowing subject with a special faculty for apodictic truth. Seen by Rorty as secular theories meant to identify the necessary grounding of knowledge previously provided by the Divine or natural order, foundationalisms of all stripes have in common the desire for the subject to escape temporality and contingency into a transcendent viewpoint capable of experiencing the power of truth (for example, “truth resists attempts to refute it”), pressing rational minds toward consensus. Thus, in Rorty’s opinion, the invention of the transcendent subject is an attempt to salvage epistemologically a relation to a metaphysical realm that has been abandoned by post-Kantian thinkers. He holds that foundationalists arbitrarily raise to the level of universal the mundane linguistic practices and social norms that have dominated minds at some moment and in some locale. Rorty rejects the cultural hegemony implied in foundationalist narratives, and by doing so asserts a historicist belief in the inescapable embeddedness of the human condition in the flux and flow of evolutionary change. There is, from his perspective, no neutral, ahistorical standpoint, no “God’s-eye viewpoint” from which to gain a Parmenidean perspective on what there is. What we can assent to is a plurality of standpoints that achieve social acceptance because of their utility in and for the here and now.

e. Ethnocentricism

A natural order of reason is one more “relic” of the idea that truth consists of correspondence to the intrinsic nature of things. Absent an ahistorical standpoint from which to judge the intrinsic nature of reality, there is no such thing as a proposition that is justified without qualification or an argument which will better approximate the truth per se. For Rorty, there is no natural context-independent reason which somehow heralds and underlies all descriptive vocabulary. He considers the idea of context-independent truth a misguided effort to hypostatize the adjective “true” by repackaging it in epistemological terms of the Platonic attempt to hypostatize the adjective ‘good.’ Only such hypostatization causes one to believe that there is a goal of inquiry beyond justification to relevant contemporary audiences. Rorty holds: “All reasons are reasons for a particular people, restrained by spatial, temporal, and social conditions.” When we have justified our beliefs to an audience considered pertinent, we need not make any further claims, universal or otherwise.

To insist on context-independence would be to endow reason with causal powers that enable a particular descriptive vocabulary to resist refutation regardless of time, place, and social conditions. Alternately, one could suppose an ideal audience with the ability to speak a privileged vocabulary that allows its speakers to escape human limits and achieve a God-like grasp of the totality of possibility. But Rorty insists that there is neither such an audience, nor a privileged vocabulary that provides a priori a language of justification with the potential to draw all mundane audiences into universal consensus. There are only diverse linguistic communities, each of which has its own final vocabulary and its shared context-embedded perspective on reality, a reality that is forever and already interpreted from that standpoint.

Since, from the Rortyan outlook, the reality-appearance distinction is a relic of our authoritarian ontotheological tradition—the transmutation of the extrinsic, non-human power (that must be submitted to) into the secularized intrinsic nature of reality that still carries with it all the authoritarian drawbacks inherent in the tradition’s outdated metaphor (for example, Habermasian “universal validity”)—then the secularized metaphor of power/submission ought to be discarded along with the remnants of its religious origin.

But Rorty does not want to throw out entirely the fruits of Western culture. To the contrary, he says that he is “lucky” to having been raised within this cultural tradition, especially because of its tendencies for critical analysis and tolerance. In this vein, Rorty responds to a Habermasian critique: “I regard it a fortunate historical accident that we find ourselves in a culture . . . which is highly sensitized to the need to go beyond (dogmatic borders of thought).” Nevertheless, he does not hold that his luck is any different from that felt by Germans who considered themselves fortunate to enroll in the Hitler Youth. It’s simply a chance matter as to which society one is born, and what set of beliefs is valued therein.

Carrying forward his naturalistic, Darwinian views, Rorty sees humans as creatures whose beliefs and desires are for the most part formed by a process of acculturation. With no non-relative criteria or standards for telling real justifications from merely apparent ones, it follows that there can be no teleological mechanism independent of specific social narratives to determine the socioethical superiority of one solidarity over another. Since we all acquire our moral identity and obligations from our native culture (the niche in which we find ourselves), why not embrace our own social virtues as valid and try to redefine the world in terms of them? This is Rorty’s argument for ethnocentricism; a position from which one “can give the notion such as ‘moral obligation’ a respectable, secular, non-transcendental sense by relativizing it to a historically contingent sense of moral identity.” And if this is a form of cultural relativism, so be it. Rorty does not fear relativism, since fear grows from the concern that there is nothing in the universe to hang onto except ourselves. This is his humanist point against the claim that reason transcends local opinion; there is only ourselves nested in the habits of action evolving over time into the current, contingent societal solidarities we find useful for achieving our purposes.

f. Philosophy as Metaphor

In line with Rorty’s nominalism is his idea of philosophy as metaphor. Once one abandons the search for truth and for a reality that is concealed behind the everyday world, the role of a social practice in the vanguard of cultural change and innovation (philosophical or otherwise) is, or ought to be, to liberate humanity from old metaphors that are rooted in superstition, mystification, and a religion-inspired mindset. He suggests that this can be done by offering new metaphors and reshaping vocabularies that will accommodate new, “abnormal” insights. In this function, philosophy will note the fears kindled by past practices as well as the hopes springing from the present, and reconcile them by avoiding ancient fallacies while projecting contemporary justified beliefs into the future. Key to this project is the acknowledgement that philosophical theories have tended to reify that which had been proposed in the past as useful metaphors. This cognitive “idolatry” is an outgrowth of the adoption of the correspondence theory of knowledge. Beginning with Plato’s use of perception to analogize the relation of the psyche to the Forms, philosophers have mistakenly tried to make a word-world connection in order to ground reality in thought. The trouble with this approach is that it causes one to look behind the vocabulary for a non-human entity or force which grounds its meaning in our consciousness. Rorty thinks that this representational scheme is wrongheaded because it confuses use for content. He holds that it is rather in the use of words that we come to grips with our ever-changing environment. Successful adaptation of metaphors to new conditions is more likely when one drops the expectation that words are made adequate by that environment, or a creative agency of that environment. It is left to humans to consciously fashion their own metaphors to cope with the world. Freed from the tyranny of locating and adopting a non-human vocabulary, human ingenuity and creativity will craft undreamt of possibilities as surely as Galileo reinvented our understanding of the “heavens” by jettisoning of the outmoded Aristotelian crystalline celestial metaphor, or as Thomas Kuhn reinvented our understanding of paradigms by recasting the Kantian idiom.

g. Anti-representational Metaphilosophy

Rorty’s anti-representationalism is closely associated with his anti-essential nominalism. While Rorty does not doubt that there is a reality that is recalcitrant to some (but not all) linguistic approaches (that is to say that not all attempts at constructing language-games prove useful to our local purposes work), he rejects that there can ever be a narrative that has a privileged viewpoint and/or has the final determination on “What there is.” Traditional Western Philosophy’s establishment of, alternately, rationalist, empiricist or transcendental worldviews to address the problem of depicting in words and ideas what is, in fact, does not so much outline a pattern of progress in expressing more adequate illustrations of reality; rather, it presents a history of the “idea idea” which Rorty holds as a red herring. Since the time of Plato, struggles over first principles have yielded academic debates that are seemingly endless attempts to characterize the world, but that are counterproductive to conversations aimed at changing the world. Rorty suggests that philosophers change the subject. Subject-changing is possible because there can be no common framework in which all minds participate. The possibility of different language-games offers a multitude of frameworks from which to choose, given Rorty’s anti-representational stance. No framework is more or less part of the fabric of the universe. Rather, dialogue ought to supersede certainty; interpretation to trump the search for truth. First-order philosophical search for a stable, final vocabulary that coherently captures the world in words or accurately corresponds to it drops out and is replaced with narrative-driven conversation. The plurality of interpretations that follows opens the way for an ever-evolving exchange concerning the function of proposed statements relative to a context; a series of pragmatic dialogues about what course of action is best fitted to a contemporary situation.

A special case stands out for Rorty’s anti-representationalist critique, that of scientism. Since the Enlightenment, objectivity via method has been the standard for scientific investigators. The systematic reading of the material world by those who are expert in the vocabulary of the sciences (that is, the quantification of observation statements) privileges these “rational” interpretations over all others. The assumption is that the universe is at its core a unified complex readily available for accurate and thorough analysis once one assumes the proper epistemological stance. And once taken that stance will build upon itself in an ever-increasing accumulation of objective knowledge. This optimistic progressivism is questioned by Rorty. Following Dewey’s dismissal of the dispassionate, autonomous knower of culturally neutral, objective knowledge, Rorty criticizes scientism’s image of the givenness of the world and the ability of scientists to discover the rational structures inherent in it. Viewing knowledge as an historical and cultural artifact, Rorty wishes to replace scientism’s systematic worldview with an “edifying” philosophy that treats science as just one among many non-privileged approaches, each of which projects sets of rules designed to bring about the well-being of a community. The choice of which of these approaches is most beneficial is the topic of the open-ended, interdisciplinary conversation favored by Rorty. Being free from teleological constraint, this sort of dialogue carries with it the expectation that convergent consensus is never possible; thus science cannot be the focal point of, or unique conduit for, an ever improving meeting of minds. Instead, Rorty considers all consensuses as contingent, partial, and on-going solidarities directed toward some specific practical outcome.

h. Pragmatic Pluralism

With no neutral ground from which to establish convergent consensus, all positions are competing ideas; presumed goods struggling for their existence. Thus, each is a live option until the practice is accepted by, or it is abandoned as non-workable for, a society. Appeals beyond the social environment have been eliminated by Rorty’s anti-foundational and anti-essential stances. Without a vocabulary that captures either the way the world is or a core human nature, there is never any possibility to locate a metaphysical foundation for truth. Equally unrealizable is a distinct epistemological platform from which to resolve differences between incongruent intuitions. Without transcendent or transpersonal standards, Liberal and Conservative narratives, atheist and fundamentalist ideologies, and realist and pragmatist approaches all vie equally for a cultural niche determining what works for a group at a given time. With everything unanchored and in flux, there is never a settled outcome, no final vocabulary that prevents the emergence of novel practices that threaten to eclipse the established ways of life. A plurality of metaphors thrives and in doing so upsets the settled, the canonical, the convergent consensus, keeping the conversation going. Rorty contends that it is the bruising competition among rival frameworks, including his own, that will result in a shakeout of the best framework fit for the times, around which will form a solidarity (albeit, contingently) of similarly-minded individuals. And the bounty of ideas, project, and programs will be surprisingly novel and astoundingly different.

i. Solidarities, Poets, and the Jeffersonian Strategy

The idea of a convergent consensus is built around the expectation that there is a grounding metaphysical standard “beyond” the flux of time, culture and circumstance, and that this standard has been the object of search for millennia. But to locate this standard, the seekers already must be at the consensus point which is being sought; they must already know what this is in order to find the real. Rorty considers this sort of Platonist reminiscence to be a vicious circle that assumes the consequent, i.e., that an objective point of view, in fact, exists. Even the Kantian attempt to circumvent this problem by asserting that we can have a priori knowledge of objects that we constitute ignores the troubling fact, according to Rorty, that Kant never explained how we have apodictic knowledge of the “constituting activities” of a transcendental ego. This attempt at self-foundation founders in another, more threatening way. In the placing of the “outer” into the “inner, constituting space,” the rational mind (seen as Reason itself) becomes the arbiter of cultural norms (“culture” being conceived as a collection of knowledge claims). Thus the discipline of philosophy becomes the keeper of the status quo, whose opinions and mode of thinking becomes the one true standard for any other discipline to measure itself against. However, Rorty emphatically denies that Philosophy as a discipline holds this crucial role. In fact, he argues that we should put aside the Kantian distinctions between disciplines as inegalitarian, and favor an open-mindedness based upon the Jeffersonian model of religious tolerance.

This Jeffersonian strategy, in line with Rorty’s historicist anti-foundationalism and anti-essentialist nominalism, is designed to encourage the abandonment of any claim of the discovery of an all-encompassing system of thought that serves as the legitimizer of all other practices. Seen as a remnant of the onto-theological period in human thinking, systematic philosophy suffers the same ills as traditional dogmatic theologies in that they both project as universal historically embedded, cultural values. The remedy that Rorty wishes to apply to this systematizing is to split public practices from private beliefs, treating all theories as narratives on par with each other, and to shelter edifying impulses toward poetic self-creativity from all pressures to conform. This dual strategy levels the playing field in the public sector, allowing unrestricted democratic dialogue between groups holding rival narratives (solidarities), while at the same time liberating creative thought from the normalizing restraints of the alleged privileged rationality asserted by Theological, Philosophical or Scientific solidarities. What is denied in Rorty’s Jeffersonian strategy is any universal commensuration in either the epistemological or metaphysical sphere, as well as the privilege of the rational in a supposed hierarchical system of reality. What is gained is the possibility for the expression of alternative, “abnormal” voices in the conversation of humankind, which, in potential, may prove to be persuasive enough to draw a growing number of adherents into its ranks, thereby creating a new solidarity better adapted to the contemporary environment, with its unique set of issues and requirements than are prior narratives. The evolution of unique narratives is progressive in the sense that each society and every era can discard encrusted customs and embrace novel practices that seem best in addressing the problems at hand. It is also contingent because there can be no final vocabulary that gets it right about human nature or the nature of existence. All is in play “all the way down” in an essence-less world where any foundational pretence to a harmony between the human subject and the objects of knowledge is eschewed, and where justification is confined to “beliefs that cannot swing free from the nonhuman environment.”

j. Non-reductive Materialism and the Self

Rorty sees the division between reductive materialism and subjectivism as a pseudo-problem originating with the Cartesian mind-body dualism. These incommensurate descriptions both pose as the sole truth on the subject of the nature of ontologically real objects. Wishing to “dedivinize” philosophy, science and discussions on the self, Rorty occasionally concentrates on the last of this troika in an effort to unsettle the western notion about an underlying substantial metaphysical center grounding existence. In his “Contingency of Selfhood,” Rorty defends contingencies and discontinuities of the “I” against realist thought. It is plausible that most Enlightenment thinkers could not fathom how inert matter and its motion could account for the first person experience of human consciousness. Rorty suggests that fear against the association of selfhood to the dying human animal may be a motivation for philosophers since Plato to posit a central essence for individuals. To this concern Rorty resorts to non-reductive materialism to explain away the mind-body issue that has concerned thoughtful people for the last four hundred years.

The use of descriptive vocabularies plays an important part in Rorty’s gloss on the human “self.” In his narrative, one vocabulary is centered on the description of physical objects and another is concerned with the discursive agent. The discursive agent may redescribe all objects, including him/herself, as subject in ever more “abnormal” terms without limits. Nevertheless, once a description is dedicated to a physicalist’s accounts of brain activity, it becomes incumbent upon the describing agent to note differences in human experience with a different vocabulary, vocabulary that does not assume the consequent concerning the alleged existence of the mind independent from the body. Rorty claims to do this by assigning parallel descriptions to both mind and brain without claiming that there is a center to either.

Whereas the brain can be redescribed as the continual reweaving of the electrical charges across the web of neural synapses, the mind can be redescribed as the constant reweaving of different beliefs and desires, redistributing truth values among the web of interlocking statements. Under Rorty’s description the brain is simply the amalgamation of synapses with no center, i.e., nothing that is independent of this agglomeration. Equally, Rorty holds that the mind is exactly a contingent network of beliefs and desires, having nothing at its core to which the bundled beliefs and desires adhere. It follows there is no self that has these mental elements, rather the self is these elements, and nothing more. Gone is the Cartesian tendency to reify the self and a material object as substantial in order to acknowledge that they each have causal effects. Gone is the mistaken idea of a self as an object represented to ourselves (for example, Descartes’ claim that he is a “thinking thing”). And gone also is the urge to completely separate the mental from the physical ontologically. There are two incommensurate descriptions of causal interaction. In this way, Rorty’s non-reductive materialist account of the self accords well with his nominalism, which rejects the sentence-fact dichotomy as firmly as his anti-essentialism rejects the subject-object split.

Of course, in keeping with Rorty’s narrative, there is no reason why one should limit the descriptions of the self, the mind, and the brain to Rorty’s vocabulary usage. If sometime in the future it serves the purpose of those who live at the time to redescribe Rorty’s account, say along strictly neuron-physiological lines that may accurately pair specific beliefs and desires to identifiable brain functions, then its utility would demand the adoption of this narrative. But until then, Rorty would argue for a holistic approach that does not seek a one-to-one identity between brain functions and mental occurrences, or a reduction of one to the other.

5. Critics

A philosophy that is controversial and iconoclastic as Richard Rorty’s is bound to have an abundance of critics. Space permits the consideration of only a few, those considered serious objections to his neopragmatism. Here is a representative sample of philosophers who pose challenges to key aspects of Rorty’s philosophy.

a. Hilary Putnam, John McDowell, and James Conant

Hilary Putnam doubts Rorty’s ability to sustain his claim to be a pragmatic realist. Turning to Rorty’s pivotal view of justification, Putnam, in Rorty and His Critics (Brandom: 2000), characterizes it as having two aspects: contextual and reforming. About the former, Putnam says that Rorty, by making justification a sociological matter, has apparently made a commitment to majority sentiment. Nevertheless, Putnam declares, by allowing that the majority can be wrong, Rorty is being either incoherent or illicitly introducing a standard that is independent of the social context. Knowing that Rorty rejects ahistorical foundations Putnam takes up the reformist aspect of Rortyan justification to see if Rorty can escape his apparent inconsistency. Rorty’s reformist position suggests that progress in talking and acting results not from being more adequate to some non-human (natural or transcendent) independent standard than one’s predecessors. Rather progress occurs because it seems to us to be clearly better. To this definition of progress Putnam responds that whether the outcome of some reform is deemed to be good or bad is logically independent from whether most people see it as a reform. Otherwise, the meaning of “progress” reduces to a subjective notion and “reform” to an arbitrary preference for a way of life. Therefore, the implication is that if we are to meaningfully use the terms “progress” and “reform,” there has to be better and worse non-subjective standards and norms. So it follows that there are non-sociological, objective ways to appreciate reality. Otherwise in a Rortyan anti-representationalist world of competing “stories” enabling one to cope or failing to help one cope with the “environment,” Rorty’s own narrative of redescriptions becomes one among many non-privileged, solipsistic perspectives, and thus loses its persuasive power.

James Conant and John McDonald complement Putnam’s position. James Conant argues that Rorty’s narrative, when taken to its logical conclusion ultimately undermines the tolerant, liberal, egalitarian society Rorty claims to value. Conant offers that a liberal democratic community must contain three internally-linked, non-transcendent concepts necessary for human voice: freedom, community, and truth. He argues that in the absence of this interlocking troika an alternative triad arises: the prevalence of solitude, uniformity, and an Orwellian doublethink. This latter threesome force upon those inculcated into such a social order barren conformity to meta-ideology that denies the very ability to reformulate language in ways that might threaten the veracity of that order. This is accomplished by relativizing truth; by reducing truth to the status of empty compliments and by utilizing cautionary doubt as a method by which each individual replaces inconvenient memories with group ‘justified’ assertions.

John McDowell refines Putnam’s position, by offering a distinction that actually makes Rorty, Putnam, and Kant allies! He attempts this difficult association by distinguishing the fear of a contingent life and the subsequent appeal to a Freudian father-like force that provides us iron-clad answers and norms to live up to from the desire to have us answerable to the way things are. McDowell suggests that Kant too wished to combat the denial of human finitude, and the consequent withdrawal from the contingent into the safety of an eternal realm, by claiming that appearance was not a barrier preventing us from gazing at reality objectively, but is the very reality we as rational human beings aspire to know. In this way McDowell thinks that Kant, admittedly anti-metaphysical, was as anti-priesthood as Dewey—extending the Protestant Reformation’s idiosyncratic connection to a non-human reality into Philosophy—and in line with Rorty’s anti-epistemology stance—that we are always ensconced within the human frame of reference. The upshot of McDowell’s distinction of objectivity from epistemic escapism is that even as we are located inextricably within a vocabulary there can be joined a unified discourse where the combination of a disquotational, descriptive use of the word "true" and the use of "true" that treats this term as a norm of inquiry is possible.

Conant builds Putnam’s and McDowell’s arguments for the ascendancy of objectivity (properly understood) over solidarity by linking Orwell’s “Newspeak” and Rorty’s New Pragmatism. Conant constructs his argument first by offering the non-controversial claim that freedom of belief is achievable only when one can decide for oneself concerning the facts in a community that nurtures this sort of freedom. This community can only be sustained when its norms of inquiry are not biased toward lock-step solidarity with one’s peers, but are geared toward the encouragement of independent attempts at relating one’s claims about the way things are with the way things are, in fact (or as Conant writes: ‘turning to the facts’). Real human freedom can be expressed when one is able to autonomously believe and to test one’s belief for its truth and falsity in a public forum unconstrained by sociological determinants. Freedom, Conant claims, is therefore a human capacity that emerges from the human condition and need not be attributable to any Realist thesis. Thus, Conant agrees with Rorty that there is nothing deep within us; there isn’t any indestructible nature or eternal substance. Nevertheless, a systematic effort to eliminate the vocabulary containing terms such as ‘eternal truths,’ ‘objective reality,’ and traits ‘essential to humanity’ would be akin to George Orwell’s Newspeak, in that such an elimination would render impossible human freedom by making it impossible to share in language such ideas and concepts. The very possibility of interpretive communication and dialogue among free thinkers engaged in the search for truth would be banished by the sort of control exerted over language that Rorty ironically insists is necessary to change vocabularies and to establish a liberal democratic utopia.

b. Donald Davidson and Bjorn Ramberg

Donald Davidson combines the theory of action with the theory of truth and meaning. For him an account of truth is simultaneously an account of agency and vice versa. By referring to “rationality,” “normativity,” “intentionality,” and “agency” as if they were co-extensive predicates, Davidson is able to claim that descriptions emerge as descriptions of any sort only against a taken-for-granted background of purposeful action. Agency—the ability to offer descriptions rather than merely make noise—only appears if a normative vocabulary is already in use. Normative behavior on the part of the communicators involved makes the case that the intentional stance is unlike the biological stance. In Rorty and His Critics, Davidson raises the “underdetermination/radical interpretation” issue, disputing Rorty’s long-held pragmatic claim that there is no significant philosophical difference between the psychological and the biological, as there is no significant difference between the biological and the chemical, once we abandon the idea of “adequacy to the world.”

Bjorn Ramberg, in support of Davidson’s contention in “Post-ontological Philosophy of Mind: Rorty Versus Davidson,” suggests that the linkage between mind and body is not the irreducibility of the intentional to the physical, but the understanding of the inescapability of the normative. Considering each other as persons with mutual obligations presupposes all pragmatic choices of descriptive vocabularies. We could never deploy some descriptive narrative unless we first deployed a normative vocabulary. As followers of norms, we cannot stop prescribing and just describe. Describing is part and parcel of a rule-governed conversation, an exchange conducted by people who talk to each other assuming the vocabulary of agency. Thus, members of a community are to be considered as interlocutors and not as “parametrics” (causal happenings). Rorty is correct in that there are many descriptive vocabularies (ways to bring salience to different causal patterns of the world) and many different communities of language-users. Yet, until recently, Rorty did not accept Davidson’s position that all individuals who engage others in descriptive language-use must speak prescriptively (see section 3e above), or that it is the inescapability of the vocabulary of normality (rather than the claims about the irreducibility of intentionality, rejected by Rorty) that marks off agency from biology. This leads directly to Davidson’s Doctrine of Triangulation. We are a plurality of agents (one corner of a triangle) each engaged in the project of describing to each other the “world” (a second corner), and interpreting each other’s descriptions of it (the third corner). As Ramberg writes:

We can while triangulating criticize any given claim about any description, we cannot ask for an agreement on the process of triangulation itself, for it would be another case of triangulation. The inescapability of norms is the inescapability—for both the describers and agents—of triangulation.

Davidson’s insight, as elucidated by Ramberg, has caused Rorty to revise his view that norms are set within solidarities alone. Rorty now holds that norms hover, so to speak, “over the whole process of triangulation.” While he still does not accept the positing of a second norm of factual reality as suggested by John McDowell, the emergent property of norms springing from dialogue cannot be reduced to, or identified with its biological (in a fashion similar to flocking, schooling, etc) or chemical (like H2O from hydrogen and oxygen, and so forth) counterparts.

c. Daniel Dennett

Daniel Dennett, in “Faith in the Truth” and “Postmodernism and Truth,” rejects postmodern critiques of physicalist science. Dennett’s target is relativism. Specifically, he charges that Rorty’s stance against the “chauvinism of scientism” leads to blurring the line between serious scientific debate and frivolous historicist exchanges that include science merely as one of many voices in the conversation of humankind. Thus, there is a danger in jettisoning “the matter of fact versus no matter of fact distinction.” What is lost is the ability to make true assertions about reality in terms other than the sociological. Dennett objects to the postmodern notion that what is true today—that leads us to assert, for example, that DNA is a double helix—may not be true tomorrow if the conversation shifts. Rather, he claims that there are actual justifications of what certain sociological facts obtain when it comes to the natural sciences (that is, that there is more agreement among scientists, that the scientific language-game is a better predictor of future events than other vocabularies, and so forth). To confirm our observations we must form good representations of reality. This is what allows these representations to be justified, beyond being good tools that lead to further coping strategies vis-à-vis nature. Otherwise, Rorty’s attitude—expressed as “give us the tools, make the moves, and then say whatever you please about their representational abilities. . . (f)or what you say will be, in the pejorative sense, ‘merely philosophical’”—dismisses scientific objectivity while aiding and abetting postmodern relativists who threaten to replace theory with jargon. Dennett considers writers holding such attitudes to be in “flatfooted ignorance of the proven methods of scientific truth-seeking and their power.”

d. Jurgen Habermas, Nancy Fraser, and Norman Geras

Jürgen Habermas writes in “Richard Rorty’s Pragmatic Turn,” “In forfeiting the binding power of its judgments, metaphysics also loses it substance.” With its loss philosophy can be rescued from its drift only by a post-metaphysics “metaphysics.” This is what Rorty is attempting to do. In his hands, philosophy must become more than academic; it must become relevant in a practical way. Recasting Heidegger in post-analytic terms, Rorty see the deflationary trends in contemporary philosophy as leading to its own negation if left unchecked by edifying creativity. It is a pattern that can lead to extinction if there is not new life breathed into old metaphors by restating them, stripped of their Platonic bias. Central to this bias, according to Habermas’ understanding of Rorty, is the Platonic distinction between “convincing” and “persuading.” Rorty wishes to replace the representational model of knowledge with a communication model that means to replace objectivity with successful intersubjective solidarity. But, Habermas contends that the vocabulary which Rorty employs blurs the line between participant and observer. By assimilating interpersonal relationships into adaptive, instrumental behaviors, Rorty cannot distinguish between the use of language directed towards successful actions and its use oriented toward achieving understanding. Without a conceptual marker to distinguish manipulation from argumentation, “between motivating through reason and causal exertion of influence, between learning and indoctrination,” Habermas concludes that Rorty’s project results in a loss of critical standards that make a real difference in our everyday practices.

Nancy Fraser provides in her “From Irony to Prophecy to Politics: A Response to Richard Rorty” a Habermasian case of Rorty’s difficulty in distinguishing between edification and indoctrination. While Fraser is sympathetic to Rorty’s anti-essentialist stance and his linguistic turn relative to politics and power, she has objected to his depiction of the process he suggests for the advancement of causes, Feminist or otherwise. In her response to Rorty’s “Feminism and Pragmatism,” Fraser rejects the notion advanced by Rorty that women must make a complete break with the memes that have been employed by males in Western cultures and redefine themselves out of whole cloth. The reason she gives for her objection is that the neo-Darwinian revolutionary vision that Rorty offers to Feminism is itself too embedded in the chauvinism of the past. Likening the suggested redefinition of memes to form a new feminist solidarity to the Oedipal struggle between a son and his father—manifested in the need for women to confront and overthrow those males who currently assert their semantic authority—Fraser dismisses Rorty’s zero-sum-game struggle over semantic space as one that replicates the male competitive model and does not easily fit into the psychological profile of pluralist, communal dialogue that contemporary feminists favor.

Furthermore, Fraser questions the notion of women forming solidarities, or as Rorty puts it “feminist clubs,” for the purpose of redefining themselves. She wonders which of the various definitions (for example, radical, liberal, Marxist, socialist, traditionalist, and so forth) will count as “taking the viewpoint of women as “women”? Would this not be an imposition of semantic authority by one elite, privileged “club” onto all other women? And would this not be a return to the Oedipal, confrontational style she is rejecting by inflaming the definitional differences among women along masculinist lines of class, sexual preference, and racial categories? Therefore, Fraser wants there to be a political movement along the lines of democratic socialism, where the various voices of women (and other feminists) move to create (and not discover or be assigned even in the most supportive terms) their own post-rationalist meanings, thus empowering women to speak for themselves, not as “prophets” but as themselves.

Similarly, Norman Geras takes exception to Rorty’s liberalism and his democracy of hope. Geras’s “Solidarity in the Conversation of Humanity (1995) is concerned with the possibility (more to the point, the impossibility) of a (Deweyan) humanism without any human nature. In this work, Geras refers to a lecture given by Rorty in the 1993 Oxford Amnesty series on “Human Rights”: the culture of human rights is, Rorty says, a “welcome fact of the post-Holocaust world”; it is “morally superior to other cultures.” Such affirmations, Geras notes, are part of the more general viewpoint Rorty recommends to western cultures: the viewpoint of liberalism without philosophical foundations, a pragmatically inspired hope for a tolerant and open democratic society on the basis of historical contingencies only. But in answering Geras’ rhetorical question “To whose morality is Rorty referring?” it seems, at first glance, that Rorty would answer that it is the solidarity of western liberal individuals’ values. Upon reflection, however, it would be a surprise if most of these liberals agreed with Rorty’s view on the denatured self and the ungroundedness of supporting humanitarian principles. Therefore, with principles being ad hoc adaptations of past ethnocentric norms and without the firm peg of a centered self upon which to hang his web of beliefs, Rorty has to be advancing his own idiosyncratic values. Furthermore, his values are packaged persuasively by the artful use of equivocations, allegedly as part and parcel of the human right’s culture based on a universalist notion of transcultural human integrity, notions that Rorty stoutly rejects. In short, Rorty’s reading of the human rights culture appropriates the notion of rights for his own anti-foundational, pragmatic ends: the command of semantic space of his view of humanity’s future. By doing so, Geras contends, in line with Habermas, there can be no clear distinction between the Rortyan democratic contribution to a dialogue on human ideals and a subtle insinuation of his idiosyncratic viewpoint into everyday practices making the world in his own image.

6. References and Further Reading

a. Works by Rorty

  • Rorty, Richard, Ed., The Linguistic Turn: Essays in Philosophical Method. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1967.
  • Rorty, Richard. Philosophy and the Mirror of Nature. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1979.
  • Rorty, Richard. Consequences of Pragmatism. Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1982.
  • Rorty, Richard. Contingency, Irony, and Solidarity. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1989.
  • Rorty, Richard. Objectivity, Relativism, and Truth: Philosophical Papers, Volume 1. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1991.
  • Rorty, Richard. On Heidegger and Others: Philosophical Papers, Volume 2. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1991.
  • Rorty, Richard. Truth and Progress: Philosophical Papers, Volume 3. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1998.
  • Rorty, Richard. Achieving our Country: Leftists Thoughts in Twentieth-Century America. Cambridge, Massachusetts: Harvard University Press, 1998.
  • Rorty, Richard. “McDowell, Davidson, and Spontaneity.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 58: 2, (June, 1998): 389-394.
  • Rorty, Richard. Philosophy and Social Hope. London: Penguin Books, 1999.
  • Rorty, Richard. Take Care of Freedom and Truth Will Take Care of Itself: Interviews with Richard Rorty. Ed., Edwuardo Mendieta. Stanford: Sanford University Press, 2006.

b. Works about Rorty

  • Brandom, Robert B., ed. Rorty and His Critics. Oxford: Blackwell Publishing, 2000.
  • Calder, Gideon. Rorty and Redescription. London: Weidenfeld & Nicolson, 2003.
  • Geras, Norman. Solidarity in the Conversation of Humanity. London: Verso, 1995.
  • Goodman, Russell B., ed. Pragmatism: A Contemporary Reader. New York: Routledge, 1995.
  • Hall, David L. Richard Rorty: Prophet and Poet of the New Pragmatism. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1994.
  • Malachowski, Alen, ed. Reading Rorty. Oxford: Basil Blackwell, 1990.
  • Murphy, John P. Pragmatism: From Peirce to Davidson. Boulder Colorado: Westview Press, 1990.
  • Saatkamp, Herman J., ed. Rorty & Pragmatism: The Philosopher Responds to His Critics. Nashville, Tennessee: Vanderbilt University Press, 1995.

c. Further Reading

  • Darwin, Charles. The Origin of the Species. New York: Random House, 1979.
  • Davidson, Donald. Inquiries Concerning Truth and Interpretation. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1984.
  • Dennett, Daniel. Consciousness Explained. New York: Little, Brown, 1991.
  • Dewey, John. The Quest for Certainty. New York: Capricorn Books, 1960.
  • Habermas, Jurgen. The Philosophical Discourse of Modernity. Tr., Frederick G. Lawrence. Cambridge, Massachusetts: The MIT Press, 1992.
  • Hegel, G. W. F. Phenomenology of Spirit. Tr., A. V. Miller. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1977.
  • Heidegger, Martin. Being and Time. Translators John Macquarrie and Edward Robinson. New York: Harper & Row, 1962.
  • Kuhn, Thomas. The Structure of Scientific Revolutions. Chicago: Chicago University Press, 1962.
  • Putnam, Hilary. Words and Life. Cambridge, Massachusetts: Harvard University Press, 1994.
  • Quine, Willard. V. O., Word and Object. Cambridge, Massachusetts: The MIT Press, 1960.
  • Sellars, Wilfrid. Science, Perception and Reality. New York: Humanities Press, 1963.

Author Information

Edward Grippe
Norwalk Community College
U. S. A.

Gregory of Nyssa (c. 335—c. 395 C.E.)

Gregory_of_NyssaGregory of Nyssa spent his life in Cappadocia, a region in central Asia Minor. He was the most philosophically adept of the three so-called Cappadocians, who included brother Basil the Great and friend Gregory of Nazianzus. Together, the Cappadocians are credited with defining Christian orthodoxy in the Eastern Roman Empire, as Augustine (354—430 C.E.) was to do in the West. Gregory was a highly original thinker, drawing inspiration from the pagan Greek philosophical schools, as well as from the Jewish and Eastern Christian traditions, and formulating an original synthesis that was to influence later Byzantine, and possibly even modern European, thought. A central idea in Gregory's writing is the distinction between the transcendent nature and immanent energies of God, and much of his thought is a working out of the implications of that idea in other areas--notably, the world, humanity, history, knowledge, and virtue. This leads him to expand the nature-energies distinction into a general cosmological principle, to apply it particularly to human nature, which he conceives as having been created in God's image, and to rear a theory of unending intellectual and moral perfectibility on the premise that the purpose of human life is literally to become like the infinite nature of God.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. God
  3. World
  4. Humanity
  5. History
  6. Knowledge
  7. Virtue
  8. Conclusion
  9. References and Further Reading

1. Life

Gregory of Nyssa was born about 335 C.E. in Cappadocia (in present-day Turkey). He came from a large Christian family of ten children--five boys and five girls. Gregory's family is significant, for two of the most influential people on his thought are two of his elder siblings--his sister Macrina (c.327—379) and Basil (c.330—379), the oldest boy in the family. Along with Basil and fellow-Cappadocian and friend Gregory of Nazianzus (c.329—c.391), Gregory of Nyssa forms the third of a trio of Christian thinkers, collectively known as the Cappadocians, who established the main lines of orthodoxy in the Christian East. Basil, who became the powerful bishop of Caesarea, was the most politically skilled churchman of the group. He appointed his younger brother to the see by which he is now known, and rightly predicted that Gregory would confer more distinction on the obscure town of Nyssa than he would receive from it. Gregory of Nazianzus was a brilliant orator, best known for his five "theological orations," which succinctly summarized the Cappadocian consensus. But the deepest thinker of the three was Gregory of Nyssa. Gregory stands at a crossroads in the theological development of the Christian East: he sums up many of the ideas of his great predecessors, such as the Jewish philosopher Philo of Alexandria (c.20 B.C.E.—c.54 C.E.) and the Christian Origen (c.185—254 C.E.), and initiates the development of themes that will appear in the most prominent of the later Byzantine thinkers, notably the Pseudo-Dionysius (c.500) and Gregory Palamas (1296 - 1359).

As the eldest boy, Basil was the only one of Gregory's siblings to receive a formal education. So Basil in all probability became the teacher of his younger brother. If so, he certainly did an excellent job, for in this case the pupil went on to outshine the teacher. Gregory is thoroughly at home with the philosophers that were in vogue in his day: Plato (427—347 B.C.E.)—especially as "updated" and systematized by Plotinus (204 - 270 CE)--Aristotle (384 - 322 BCE), and the Stoics. On reading his works, one cannot but be struck by the abundance of allusions to the Platonic dialogues. Yet it would be a mistake to say, as Cherniss famously does, that "Gregory . . . merely applied Christian names to Plato's doctrine and called it Christian theology" (The Platonism of Gregory of Nyssa: 62). As will be seen below, there is a pronounced linear view of history in Gregory's thought, which can only be of Hebrew provenance. Moreover, the reader will discover an originality in Gregory that anticipates not only his Byzantine successors, but also such moderns as John Locke (1632 - 1704) and Immanuel Kant (1724 - 1804).

The turning point in Gregory's life came about 379, when both his brother Basil and his sister Macrina died. The burning issue at the time was the Arian heresy, which by then had entered its last and most logically rigorous phase. Arianism was a Christological heresy, named for its founder Arius (c. 256 - 336), that held that Christ was neither divine nor human, but a sort of demigod. The principal defender of Arianism at the time, Eunomius of Cyzicus (c. 325 - c. 394), argued that the Arian doctrine could even be derived from the very concept of God, as will be seen below. For most of this period, the brunt of the battle for orthodoxy had been led by Basil; but when he died, and shortly thereafter Gregory's beloved sister, Gregory felt that the responsibility for defending orthodoxy against the Arian heresy had fallen on his shoulders. Thus began the most productive period of one of the most brilliant of Christian thinkers--far too little known and appreciated in the West.

That period was launched by the publication of his Against Eunomius, Gregory's four-book refutation of that last phase of the Arian heresy. It was followed by many more works, the most significant being On the Work of the Six Days, Gregory's account of the creation of the world; On the Making of Man, his account of the creation of humankind; The Great Catechism, the most systematic statement of Gregory's philosophy of history; On the Soul and the Resurrection, a dialogue with Macrina detailing Gregory's eschatology; Biblical commentaries on the life of Moses, the inscriptions of the Psalms, Ecclesiastes, the Song of Songs, the Beatitudes, and the Lord's Prayer; theological works on Trinitarian and Christological doctrine; and shorter ascetic and moral treatises. Many of these will be discussed below.

Gregory was present at the final defeat of Arianism in the Council of Constantinople of 381. Nothing more is heard from him after about 395 CE.

2. God

Gregory's concept of God is born out of the Arian controversy. Arianism arose out of the need to make sense of the apparently conflicting Biblical depictions of Christ. For example, how is one to understand Jesus' claim that "I and the Father are one" (John 10:30) when it seems to be contradicted by the admission that "the Father is greater than I" (John 14:28)? This sort of problem prompted Arius to postulate that Christ was neither divine nor human, but something in between--a demigod, the oldest and most perfect created being, to be sure, but created nonetheless. By Gregory's day, the leading spokesman for Arian theology was Eunomius of Cyzicus, who argued for Arianism on strictly philosophical grounds. The created nature of Christ could be derived by an analysis of the very concept of God, Eunomius argued; for it is God's essential nature to be unbegotten, whereas Christ is confessed to be "begotten of the Father." If this sort of argument were allowed to stand, what was to become the orthodox faith--the faith enunciated at Nicaea in 325 CE that Christ was literally "of the same substance" with the Father--would be radically transformed.

Gregory counters Eunomius, not by simply staking out the opposite position and defending it with Scriptural artillery, as most of his fellow Nicenes had done, but, more interestingly, by repudiating the central presupposition of Eunomian theology--that one can derive by a process of analysis concepts that are essentially predicated of God. God is incomprehensible; thus, it is presumptuous in the extreme to suppose that God can be defined by a set of human concepts. When we are speaking of God's inner nature, all that we can say is what that nature is not (Against Eunomius II [953 - 960, 1101 - 1108], IV 11 [524]). In saying this, Gregory anticipates the negative theology of the Pseudo-Dionysius and much medieval thought.

Nevertheless, if that were the whole story--if we were left with God's utter incomprehensibility and nothing more--then Gregory's theology would be a very much stunted exposition of Christianity. After all, in the Beatitudes Christ promises, "Blessed are the pure in heart, for they shall see God." (Matt. 5:8) If God's inner nature is knowable only negatively, how is this possible? More generally, if God is simply some remote, unknowable entity, what possible relation to the world could God ever have? Gregory answers these questions by distinguishing between God's nature (phusis) and God's "energies" (energeiai)--the projection of the divine nature into the world, initially creating it and ultimately guiding it to its appointed destination (Beatitudes VI [1269]). The idea of God's energies in Gregory's theology approximates to the Western concept of grace, except that it emphasizes God's actual presence in those parts of creation which are perfected just because of that presence. By distinguishing between God's nature (sometimes he uses the word "substance"--ousia) and God's energies, Gregory anticipates the more famous substance-energies distinction of the fourteenth century Byzantine theologian Gregory Palamas.

Does all of this have any sort of rational basis? Though he frequently appeals to Scripture to support his claims, Gregory does in fact argue for the existence of God. And although he concedes that God's inner nature will always remain a mystery to us, Gregory holds that we can attain some knowledge of God's energies. This does not mean, however, that God does not have a transcendent nature. As will be seen below, for Gregory everything that exists has an inner nature that cannot be known immediately and is knowable only through its energies. God is only the most striking instance of this. If it can be shown that God exists, it follows necessarily in Gregory's mind that God has a nature. But God's existence is derived from our knowledge of God's energies, and those energies are in turn known both indirectly and directly.

The indirect route relies on the order apparent in the cosmos. The fact that the universe is orderly indicates that it is governed according to some rational plan, which implies the existence of a divine Planner (Against Eunomius II [984 - 985, 1009, 1069]; Great Catechism Prologue [12], 12 [44]; Work of the Six Days [73]; Life of Moses II 168 [377 - 380]; Ecclesiastes I [624], II [644 - 645]; Song of Songs I [781 - 784], XI [1009 - 1013], XIII [1049 - 1052]; Beatitudes VI [1268]). In noting this, Gregory is relying on an argument that had been around since the early Stoics--the argument from design (cf. Cicero, Nature of the Gods II 2.4 - 21.56). Now there are several things to notice about this argument. In the first place it is an analogical one: just as a work of art leads us to infer the existence of an artist, so the artistry displayed in the order of nature suggests the existence of a Creator. But if Gregory's argument is nothing more than a generalized appeal to the harmony of the universe, it is not a very persuasive basis for proving the existence of God. For that there are laws of nature is nothing surprising: to have anything at all, from cosmos to quark, is to have order. If this is all that Gregory means, his argument at best reduces to the cosmological, or "first cause," argument that any chain of creating or sustaining causes requires a first member, which "everyone would call God," as Thomas Aquinas puts it (Summa Theologiae I q. 2 a. 3). Such an argument, however, is not very convincing. Why not an infinite chain of causes, for instance? Or even more to the point, why can't things exist on their own? It doesn't seem that the cosmological argument rules out either of these two possibilities.

However, what Gregory has in mind seems to be something more specific. In certain passages Gregory suggests that it is not order in general but the blending of opposites into a harmonious whole that would have never happened spontaneously, but only through the power of a Creator. The heavens accommodate contrary motions, and these motions give rise to unmoving, static laws (Inscriptions of the Psalms I 3 [440 - 441]); heavy bodies are borne downward and light bodies upward, and simple causes bring about complex effects (Soul and Resurrection [25 - 28]). In all these situations opposites not only fail to annihilate each other, but they even contribute to an overall harmony. The emphasis here is not on order in general, but on unexpected order. Given what we know about motion and rest, heaviness and lightness, and the rest, Gregory argues, we would expect to find them excluding, rather than complementing, each other. The fact that they behave in unanticipated ways can only be explained by the exercise of divine power.

Now one could object at this point that these phenomena are by no means surprising; they are surprising to Gregory only because the scientific knowledge of the fourth century is not as advanced as that of the twenty-first. However, it is not all that difficult to abstract the general point from Gregory's particular examples and to bring his argument up-to-date by replacing motion and rest, heaviness and lightness, and so forth with modern examples of phenomena that cannot be explained by any known law of physics (the "lumpiness" of the universe, for example). Yet our hypothetical objector still has a point, as is particularly obvious to us who are examining the thought of a fourth century figure seventeen centuries later. The fact that a phenomenon seems to violate what we think we know of the laws of nature does not imply that it really does violate those laws. Our knowledge may simply be too limited. So the fact that we find order in nature that we don't expect may simply be a function of the limitation of our knowledge rather than of the intervention of God in the world.

The direct method whereby God's energies are known is by examining our own moral purification. It was observed above that Gregory's concept of the divine energies is very similar to the Western concept of grace, except that for Gregory, as for Eastern thinkers in general, grace is due to the actual presence of God and not some action at a distance. As Gregory puts it, "Deity is in everything, penetrating it, embracing it, and seated in it" (Great Catechism 25 [65]). So we directly experience the divine energies in the only thing in the universe that we can view from within--ourselves. But God's energies are always a force for good. Thus we encounter them in the experience of virtues such as purity, passionlessness, sanctity, and simplicity in our own moral character: "if . . . these things be in you," Gregory concludes, "God is indeed in you" (Beatitudes VI [1272]).

Some scholars (for example, Balas, Metousia Theou, p. 128) argue that for Gregory energeiai should be translated "operations" rather than "energies," thus bringing Gregory's concept of God's energeiai more into line with Aquinas' concept of God's power (Summa Theologiae I qq. 8, 25), or of God's effects (cf. Summa Theologiae I q. 2, a. 2; q. 12, a. 12). But such an interpretation will not do for two reasons. First, Gregory insists that God exists in God's energeiai just as much as in God's nature (Against Eunomius I 17 [313], cf. Letter to Xenodorus). He could not say that if God's energeiai were merely God's operations. Second, it was shown above that Gregory uses the concept of God's energeiai to explain how the "pure in heart" can "see God." Once again, one cannot "see God" in God's operations, except in a metaphorical sense; but one can literally "see God" with the spiritual sense of sight (on the spiritual senses, see below) if God is, as Gregory claims, actually "present within oneself" (Beatitudes VI [1269]).

3. World

Gregory's account of the creation of the world reflects the nature-energies logic developed in his polemic against Eunomius. The account unfolds via an allegorical reflection on the first chapter of Genesis, and closely follows the much earlier work of Philo of Alexandria. Like Philo (Creation of the World 3.13), Gregory does not take literally the temporal sequence depicted therein; rather, he envisions creation as having taken place all at once (Work of the Six Days [69 - 72, 76]). Within this atemporal framework, the key "event" was the creation of the firmament on the second day (Work of the Six Days [80 - 85]), for it is the firmament that divides the intelligible world, created on the first day (Work of the Six Days [68 - 85]), from the sensible world, created on days three through six (Work of the Six Days [85 - 124])--again, broadly similar to Philo (Creation of the World 7.29 - 10.36, 44.129 - 44.130). Now the intelligible world was by Gregory's day pictured as a pleroma of Platonic forms existing as ideas in the mind of God; for ever since the advent of Middle Platonism in the first century BCE, the Platonic forms had been transmuted from self-subsistent entities (as Plato conceived them) to ideas in the divine mind. The classic problem with this view, going as far back as Plato himself, was to explain how these forms become instantiated in the material world.

Gregory recasts this problem in theological terms: how could God, who is immaterial, have created the material world? The answer lies in the Aristotelian distinction between the category of substance and the other categories--relation, quality, quantity, place, time, action, passion (Categories 1 - 9)--which Gregory designates with the Stoic term "qualities" (poiotetes). In themselves, qualities are ideas in the mind of God. But they can also be projected out from God; and when that happens, they become visible. Now Gregory observes that although we ordinarily speak of these immanent qualities as inhering in substances, all we really perceive are the qualities of things, not their substances. It is but a short step to the conclusion that a physical object is nothing more than the convergence of its qualities. Thus matter as such doesn't really exist; bodies are really just "holograms" formed by this convergence of qualities. Consequently there is no problem of how an immaterial God could have created a material world, for the world isn't material at all (Against Eunomius II [949]; Work of the Six Days [69]; Making of Man 24 [212 - 213]; Soul and Resurrection [124]).

Elsewhere, Gregory explicitly uses the term "energies" to cover those qualities that are immanent in the physical world. Energies, Gregory contends, are the "powers" and "movements" by which substances are "manifested"; the energy of each thing is its "distinguishing property" (idioma)--a technical Stoic term for a specific, as opposed to a generic, quality. Gregory goes so far as to assert that apart from its energies a nature not only cannot be known, but does not even exist. (Letter to Xenodorus).

Gregory's position bears a curious resemblance to that of John Locke; for according to Locke we know only the nominal essences of things, not their real essences. Thus substance is a "something . . . we know not what" (Essay II xxiii 3). All we really know of substances are their attributes, which constitute their nominal essences (Essay II xxxi 6 - 10, III iii 15 - 19). In this light consider the following passage from Against Eunomius:

Even the inquiry as to that thing in the flesh itself which assumes all the corporeal qualities has not been pursued to any definite result. For if any one has made a mental analysis of that which is seen into its component parts, and, having stripped the object of its qualities, has attempted to consider it by itself, I fail to see what will have been left for investigation. For when you take from a body its color, its shape, its hardness, its weight, its quantity, its position, its forces active or passive, its relation to other objects, what remains that can still be called a body, we can neither see of ourselves nor are taught by Scripture. . . . Wherefore also, of the elements of this world we know only so much by our senses as to enable us to receive what they severally supply for our living. But we possess no knowledge of their substance . . . . (Against Eunomius II [949])

In Gregory's account of creation, the nature-energies distinction, developed to counter Eunomius' defense of the Arian heresy, becomes extended into a general cosmological principle. The most important consequence of this extension is its application to the capstone of the cosmic order--human nature.

4. Humanity

The fundamental fact about human nature according to Gregory of Nyssa is that humans were created in the image of God. This means that because in God a transcendent nature exists which projects energies out into the world, we would expect the same structural relation to exist among human beings vis-a-vis their bodies. And in fact that is precisely what Gregory argues concerning the human nous (a word that is traditionally translated "mind" but which by the fourth century CE had submerged its intellectual connotations into the religious idea of its separateness from the physical world). In fact, so central is the nature-energies distinction to his conception of human personhood, that Gregory, again taking his inspiration from Philo (Creation of the World 46.134 - 46.135), uses it to explain the two accounts of the creation of human beings in Genesis 1 and 2 respectively. The original creation, in which God makes the human race "in our image, after our likeness" (Gen. 1:26) is of the transcendent human nature. The second creation, in which God "formed man of dust from the ground, and breathed into his nostrils the breath of life," (Gen. 2:7) is of the energies of the soul coupled with the body in which they are present (Making of Man 16 - 17 [177 - 189], 22 [204 - 205]; Soul and Resurrection [157 - 160]).

The most important characteristic of the nature of the nous is that it provides for the unity of consciousness. How are my varied perceptions, deriving from various sense organs, all coordinated with each other? Aristotle himself had addressed this problem by postulating the existence of a common sense (On the Soul III 1 - 2). But Gregory moves beyond Aristotle's psychological explanation. Using the metaphor of a city in which family members come in by various gates but all meet somewhere inside, Gregory's answer is that this can occur only if we presuppose a transcendent self to which all of one's experiences are referred (Making of Man 10 [152 - 153]). But this unity of consciousness is entirely mysterious and so is much like the mysterious nature of the Godhead (Making of Man 11 [153 - 156]). One is reminded of Kant's theory of the transcendental unity of apperception (Critique of Pure Reason, Transcendental Deduction).

Yet the nous is also extended throughout the body by its energies, which constitute our ordinary psychological experiences (Making of Man 15 [176 - 177]; Soul and Resurrection [41 - 44]). Furthermore, the nous may at different times be more or less present to the body. During waking life the energies of the nous are present throughout the body. But during sleep the presence of nous to body is much more tenuous, and at death is even more so (though not absolutely nonexistent) (Great Catechism 8 [33]; Making of Man 12 - 15 [160 - 177]; Soul and Resurrection [45 - 48]).

The parallels between the divine and the human extend all the way down to the evidential basis for the existence of the human nous. For the existence of the nous rests on a "design" argument analogous to the argument for the energies of God. Indeed the body resembles a machine; and because the latter is governed by nous, it is probable that the former is also. And just as Gregory bases his indirect argument for the existence of God's energies on the unexpected order of natural phenomena, so here he argues that because the components of a living body are observed to behave in a manner "contrary to [their] nature"--air being harnessed to produce sound, water impelled to move upward, and so forth--we may infer the existence of a nous imposing its will upon recalcitrant matter through its energies (Soul and Resurrection [33 - 40]). This should not be particularly surprising since Gregory regards the human body as a miniature, harmonious version of the cosmos as a whole (Inscriptions of the Psalms I 3 [441 - 444]).

There are two further characteristics of the human nous according to Gregory. First, because the human nous is created in the image of God, it possesses a certain "dignity of royalty" (to tes basileias axioma) that is lacking in the rest of creation. For it means that there is an aspect of the human person that is not of this world. Of no other organism can that be said. The souls of other species are totally immanent in their bodies. They have only energies, in other words. Only the human nous has a transcendent nature in addition to its energies. But that more than anything else is what makes us like God. Now God is of supreme worth. Consequently human beings have an inherent "dignity of royalty" just by virtue of being human (Making of Man 2 - 4 [132 - 136]).

Second, the nous is free. In an early work Gregory argues strenuously against astral determinism (On Fate [145 - 173]). In his more mature reflections, Gregory derives the freedom of the nous from the freedom of God. For God, being dependent on nothing, governs the universe through the free exercise of will; and the nous is created in God's image (Making of Man 4 [136]). Once again, absent the theological emphasis, on both counts there is a broad similarity with Kant (cf. Groundwork II - III); and that similarity will only become more obvious when the ways in which Gregory applies these ideas are explored within the context of his philosophy of history.

5. History

Early on, Christian theology developed a distinctive way of conceptualizing God. Rather than a simple monotheism, Christianity held that God, though unitary, could be understood as also existing as a Trinity of three Persons--a Father, the font of the Godhead; a Son, the Word (John 1:1-5) and Wisdom (Prov. 8:22-31) of God, incarnated as Jesus Christ; and a Holy Spirit, who is sent into the world by the Father. Now Gregory lived at a crossroads in the theological understanding of this doctrine. Prior to the era of the ecumenical councils, the first of which was Nicaea, discussed above, the Trinity tended to be viewed as three stages in the outflow of God into the world, with the Father as its source and the Holy Spirit as its termination. Yet beginning with the Church councils, the Trinity gradually came to be understood differently, as three distinctions to be made within God's inner nature itself. Not surprisingly, both models of the Trinity can be found in Gregory. Yet the first is clearly more congenial to his distinctive nature-energies understanding of God than the second. Indeed, one might question whether the second makes any sense at all in light of the typical Byzantine insistence on the incomprehensibility of God's inner nature: if God's nature is incomprehensible, how can we say it is both three and one--unless by doing so we wish to emphasize God's very incomprehensibility?

Not only is the earlier model of the Trinity more consistent with Gregory's view of God as a transcendent nature whose energies are projected into the world; it also adds to it a dynamic and historical dimension that the bare nature-energies distinction fails to capture on its own. As noted above, the Father is always transcendent; and at the other extreme, the Holy Spirit is God's glory (Song of Songs VI [1117]): it "manifests [the Son's] energy" (Great Catechism 2 [17]) in the world. It is the second Person of the Trinity who is the most interesting because it provides Gregory with the conceptual apparatus to explain God's operation in history, for the point at which the second Person enters the world becomes the point in time in which God is more intimately present to the world than before.

Gregory's philosophy of history begins with the fall of Adam from perfection. Earlier it was noted that according to Gregory humankind was fashioned in two creations--one of the nature of the nous, the other of its energies together with the body. The reason for the second creation was that God foresaw that humans would sin and so be unable to reproduce in a disembodied, angelic way; thus, they required bodies to allow them to propagate (Making of Man 16 - 17 [177 - 189], 22 [204 - 205]; Soul and Resurrection [157 - 160]). But the provision of bodies brings in its wake the tragic reality of death and sin, the overcoming of which was the purpose of the incarnation of Christ (Great Catechism 8 [33]).

Gregory's Christology is the story of the entry of the second Person of the Trinity into the world. In Gregory's words,

For although this last form of God's presence amongst us is not the same as that former presence, still his existence amongst us equally both then and now is evidenced: now he rules in us in order to hold together that nature in being; then he was transfused in our nature, in order that our nature might by this transfusion of the divine become itself divine--being rescued from death and put beyond the reach of the tyranny of the Adversary. For his return from death becomes to our mortal race the commencement of our return to immortal life. (Great Catechism 25 [65 - 68])

In saying that initially Christ entered "our nature," Gregory is echoing the typical Eastern Christian understanding of Christ's saving work; for according to that tradition, Christ healed the effects of the fall of humankind in the same way as he healed the sick in his earthly ministry--simply by touching. Moreover, because, as Gregory of Nazianzus put it, "what was not assumed was not healed" (Letters 101.5), Christ had to touch all aspects of human existence from birth to death (Great Catechism 27 [69 - 72], 32 [77 - 80]). Thus the former had to wait until the disease of human sinfulness had fully manifested itself (Great Catechism 29 [73 - 76]). And by submitting to the latter, Christ offered himself in bondage to Satan in exchange for the whole of humanity, whom Satan then had under his tyranny (Great Catechism 22 - 24 [60 - 65]). Precisely how, in Christ, the divine thus entered into human nature we can never know--any more than we can understand the presence of our own souls to our bodies (Great Catechism 11 [44]).But after the resurrection of Christ, the second Person of the Trinity is no longer just "transfused in our nature," but now "rules in us." In other words, the second Person is now immanent in the world in the institution of the Church; for "he who sees the Church sees Christ" (Song of Songs XIII [1048]). Indeed, Gregory deploys, once again, his characteristic insistence on the unexpected unity of opposites, this time in the Church's sacraments--life through death, justification through sin, blessing through curse, glory through disgrace, strength through weakness, and so forth--to argue for Christ's continued, miraculous presence in his Church (Song of Songs VIII [948 - 949], XIII [1045 - 1052]). For this reason, Gregory subscribes to a realist theory of the sacraments. As baptism is to the soul, so the Eucharist is to the body (Great Catechism 37 [93]). In the former case, the presence of Christ "transforms what is born with a corruptible nature into a state of incorruption" (Great Catechism 33 [84], cf. 34 [85]). In the latter, Christ "disseminates himself in every believer through that flesh, whose substance comes from bread and wine, blending himself with the bodies of believers, to secure that, by this union with the immortal, man, too, may be a sharer in incorruption"--a process Gregory calls metastoicheiosis, "transelementation" (Great Catechism 37 [97]).

In the Resurrection, Christ "knitted together [the soul and body of humankind] . . . in a union never to be broken" (Great Catechism 16 [52], cf. 35 [89]) and "recalled [our] diseased nature by repentance to the grace of its original state" (Great Catechism 8 [37]). This is difficult to understand unless one notes that Gregory describes Christ's saving work in the language of the Platonic forms (Great Catechism 16 [52], 32 [80 - 81]), which were classically construed as the originals of which the things that participate in them are mere images. Thus the resurrection and deification of Christ's human nature are the prototypes of those to follow. The key idea here seems to be, once again, that human beings were created in God's image. Formerly, that image was seen in the structural relation between the nature and energies of the human nous; now it is projected onto the axis of history.

Participation in Christ's resurrection guarantees the resurrection of the body on the part of humanity. How does this happen? For one thing, as was noted earlier, Gregory holds that the nous is never completely separated from the body anyway, so in a sense there is no paradox in its revivification, But aren't the bodily components scattered to the four winds after the decay of the corpse in the grave? How can they ever be reassembled? Gregory indeed addresses this problem and argues, strangely, that each particle of the body is stamped with one's personal identity, and so it will be possible for the nous to eventually recognize and reassemble them all (Making of Man 26 - 27 [224 - 229], Soul and Resurrection [73 - 80]).

Similarly, the logical consequence of Christ's deification is the apokatastasis--the restoration of humanity to its unfallen state. Because evil is a privation of the good and is therefore limited, Gregory believes that there is a limit to human degradation. At some point, everyone must turn around and strive for the good. Besides, the ultimate good, which is God, is infinitely attractive. Thus, Gregory endorses Origen's (First Principles I 6.3, II 10.4 - 10.8, III 6.5 - 6.6) much-maligned theories of remedial punishment and universal salvation (Great Catechism 8 [36 - 37], 26 [69], 35 [92]; Making of Man 21 - 22 [201 - 205]; Soul and Resurrection [97 - 105, 152, 157 - 160]). In other words, for Gregory as for his intellectual ancestor Origen, everyone--even Satan himself (Great Catechism 26 [68 - 69])--will eventually be saved. This means that there is no such thing as eternal damnation. Hell is really purgatory; punishment is temporary and remedial. As Gregory puts it in a colorful metaphor, the process of purgation is like drawing a rope encrusted with dried mud through a small aperture: it's hard on the rope, but it does come out clean on the other side (Soul and Resurrection [100]).

The final component of Gregory's eschatology is his famous theory of perfection, which is derived from his conviction, which he inherits from Plato (Theaetetus 176b1 - 2) through Origen (First Principles III 6.1), that the purpose of human life is to achieve nothing less than likeness to God (homoiosis theoi). But there would seem to be a problem here: if God's very essence is incomprehensible, how can we know what God is really like? The answer lies in the life of Christ, whose purpose was to demonstrate what God is like--an idea Gregory also borrows from Origen (First Principles I 2.8). Consequently, it is sufficient if we use Christ's life as a model for our own (On Perfection [264 - 265, 269]). Nevertheless, it remains that God's nature is infinitely removed from ours. But that doesn't mean that striving to become like God is pointless; it only means that the process of perfection is unending (Against Eunomius I 15 [301], 22 [340], II [940 - 941], III 6.5 [707]; Great Catechism 21 [57 - 60]; Making of Man 21 [201 - 204]; Soul and Resurrection [96 - 97, 105]; On Perfection [285]). This idea forms the core of Gregory's epistemology and ethics, which will be summarized below.

6. Knowledge

Gregory's epistemological views are nicely brought out in his reflections on the life of Moses. The central feature of Gregory's very sensitive analysis is the sequence of three theophanies that punctuate Moses' life (Song of Songs XII [1025 - 1028]). Moses is pictured as one who has a thirst for utter intimacy with God, and the three theophanies are stages on his journey to that intimacy. The first theophany is the burning bush (Life of Moses II 1 - 116 [297 - 360]). In a traditional vein, Gregory takes light to be a symbol of knowledge. So the first stage of Moses' progress is the acquisition of purely intellectual knowledge of God. This procedure is clearly rational; and Gregory will be found in what follows applying that quintessentially rational criterion--consistency--to the acquisition of religious truth.

To do this, Gregory recognizes, one must resort to philosophy as a source of conceptual tools. But philosophy in his day was almost wholly associated with paganism. So Gregory's attitude toward philosophy is somewhat ambiguous. At one time he portrays philosophy, like Moses' stepmother, as barren (Life of Moses II 10 - 12 [329]), and, like the Egyptian whom Moses killed, as something to be striven against (Life of Moses 13 - 18 [329 - 332]). Later, he recites with approval the common Christian interpretation of the Israelites' spoiling of the Egyptians as a lesson to Christians on the importance of appropriating pagan wisdom in explaining Christian doctrine (Life of Moses II 115 [360]). But Gregory's true position seems to lie between these two extremes: philosophy is useful if properly "circumcised," that is, culled of any "foreskin" alien to the spirit of Christianity (Life of Moses II 39 - 40 [337]).

Of the same ilk is Gregory's hermeneutical principle of distinguishing between the literal narrative (historia) of a Biblical passage and the spiritual contemplation (theoria) of it. In the tradition of Philo (Creation of the World 1.1 - 2.12) and Origen (First Principles I Pref., IV 1.1 - 3.5), he produces several arguments in favor of the allegorization of Scripture: (1) it is practiced by Christ, (2) it is recommended by Paul, (3) it makes passages edifying that would otherwise be immoral, and (4) it makes sense of passages that would otherwise be unintelligible or impossible (Song of Songs Preface [756 - 764]). This procedure is obviously predicated on the imperative of integrating Scripture into the entire matrix of worldly knowledge. Gregory never doubts that this matrix should be internally consistent; and he unselfconsciously employs the rule that of two claims that are mutually inconsistent, the more trumps the less edifying.

Up to this point intellectual development is characterized by the rigorous application of the rational criterion of consistency. But for Gregory the next two theophanies go far beyond the veneer of wisdom that mere logical consistency provides. The second theophany occurs atop Mount Sinai (Life of Moses II 117 - 201 [360 - 392]), and here we find not light but darkness. Thus the Israelites were first led through the desert by a cloudy pillar; and finally they arrived at the mountain of divine knowledge, which was wrapped in darkness. Thus when it comes to a more profound understanding of God, the relevant visual metaphor is darkness, not light. Similarly, the relevant auditory metaphor is silence, not speech (Ecclesiastes VII [732]). At this stage Moses learns a much deeper fact about God--that all the language we use of God is only superficial and that a truer understanding of God will only reveal God's utter incomprehensibility. One who becomes aware of God's complete mysteriousness has, paradoxically, learned more about God than the most articulate theologian.

At this stage there is no longer any reliance on the physical senses; indeed, as has been seen, at this level sight and hearing shut down. Instead, the vision of God is mediated by the so-called "spiritual senses," an idea Gregory's inherits from his theological mentor Origen (Song of Songs I 4, II 9 - 11, III 5). God cannot be perceived with the external senses, but some sort of mystical awareness of God is achievable internally. In this vein it is significant that, when discussing the spiritual senses, Gregory most often appeals, not to the "higher" senses of sight and hearing, but to the more intimate senses of smell, taste, and touch as metaphors by which to describe them (cf. Song of Songs I [780 - 784], III [821 - 828], IV [844]).

The third and final theophany revolves around Moses' vision of God's glory from the cleft in a rock (Life of Moses II 202 - 321 [392 - 429]). Moses, as Gregory interprets him, is one of those who crave ever more intimate communion with God. Earlier he had requested to know God's name; now he asks to behold God's glory. So God directs Moses to the cleft of a rock and walks by, placing a hand over the cleft to obscure Moses' sight; only after God has passed is the hand removed, but by now all Moses can see is God's back. Thus Moses finally realizes that the longing for utter intimacy with God can never be satisfied--faith will never be transformed into understanding (cf. Against Eunomius II [941])--but nevertheless "what Moses yearned for is satisfied by the very things which leave his desire unsatisfied" (Life of Moses II 235 [404]). Because God is an infinite being, the desire to know God is an infinite process; but in Gregory's eyes this really makes it much more satisfying than some static Beatific Vision. The process of becoming ever closer to God does not cease at physical death (which is, after all, just one among many passing events punctuating human existence), but continues forever.

When reflecting on Gregory's theory of knowledge as developed in The Life of Moses, one is struck by his commitment to rationalism--this despite his ambivalence on the value of pagan wisdom. Scripture for him is merely the starting point of the intellectual quest; and, given his reliance on allegory as a tool of exegesis, even that is brought within the ambit of a rational worldview. However, for Gregory the quest does not end with reason; rather, because God is utterly mysterious and infinitely remote, the quest is capped by a mystical ascent that always approaches but never reaches its destination. This intellectual dynamic is paralleled by a moral one, which will be sketched in what follows.

7. Virtue

Gregory's ethical thought explores the implications of the theme of the "dignity of royalty" of the human person, which, as has been seen, derives from the idea that humans, and humans alone, were created in the image of God. This is perhaps the most far-reaching theme of Christian ethics. For it means that because there is a part of the human person that is literally not of this world, human beings are possessed of an intrinsic worth which is unique in creation. This idea obviously imposes certain obligations on us in relation to both ourselves and others. To others we owe mercy (Beatitudes V [1252 - 1253]) and the Christian virtue of agape (Beatitudes VII [1284]). To ourselves we owe the effort to overcome the deficiencies in our likeness to God; for we are unable to contemplate God directly, and morally our free will has been compromised by the passions (pathe). Thus with respect to ourselves we must strive for intellectual and moral perfection (Beatitudes III [1225 - 1228], V [1253 - 1260).

Because he was committed to the idea that humans have a unique value that demands respect, Gregory was an early and vocal opponent of slavery and also of poverty. Against the former Gregory marshals three arguments (Ecclesiastes IV [665]): (1) Only God has the right to enslave humans, and God does not choose to do so; indeed, it was God who gave human beings their free wills. (2) How dare a person take that precious entity--the only part of the created order to have been made in God's image--and enslave it! (3) As humans who were created in the divine image, all people are radically equal; therefore, it is hubristic for some to arrogate to themselves absolute authority over others. Against the latter, he appeals, once again, to the "dignity of royalty" theme--that poverty is inconsistent with the rulership bestowed on humankind at its creation (On Compassion for the Poor [477]). Both slavery and poverty sully the dignity of human beings by degrading them to a station below the purple to which they were rightfully born; and although we may congratulate ourselves on having outlawed slavery, it is important to remember that for Gregory poverty is no different.

Moral progress is defined by two phases. Initially we must pursue the Stoic ideal of apatheia (passionlessness; cf. Diogenes Laertius, Lives VII 117), but in moderation (Beatitudes II [1216]). However, Gregory makes it clear that this moderation is due only to the exigencies of life in the flesh. At some point we must go beyond being satisfied with moderation and strive for a life which, in its breadth, is one of complete, not partial, virtue (Beatitudes IV [1241]), and, in its depth, is a matter of continual, unceasing perfection (Beatitudes IV [1244 - 1245]). The former idea, the unity of the virtues, Gregory derives, once again, from the Stoics (cf. Diogenes Laertius, Lives VII 125); but the latter is entirely his own.

Again, Gregory distinguishes between the Old Law and the New Law, which is built on the Old but goes beyond it (Beatitudes VI [1273 - 1276]). The Old Law deals with externals--works. But the New Law deals, not with works, but with the psychological springs from which works originate. To perfect one's outward behavior is one thing; to purify one's own heart is quite another. Thus, for example, whereas the Old Law prohibited murder, the New Law forbids even anger; and whereas the Old Law prohibited adultery, the New Law forbids even lust. Combining this theme with the one discussed in the last paragraph, one must conclude that Gregory sees moral progress as moving from a state of finite, external virtue to one of infinite, internal progress.

Once again, the similarity to Kant is striking. Like Gregory, Kant distinguishes four kinds of duty--perfect and imperfect duties to ourselves and to others (Metaphysical Principles of Virtue Introduction). More importantly, he distinguishes between duties of right and duties of virtue (Metaphysical Principles of Right Introduction III, Metaphysical Principles of Virtue Introduction VII). And the differences between duties of right and of virtue are similar to the distinctions Gregory draws between moderation and infinite perfection and between the Old and the New Law. Duties of right tend to deal with externals and, as "thou shalt nots," can be completely fulfilled. Duties of virtue, on the other hand, tend to deal with the will and, as "thou shalts," can never be completely fulfilled. In fact, in his famous discussion of the postulate of immortality Kant argues that the process of moral perfection is limitless and that if "ought" implies "can" it must be possible for humans to engage in an unending pursuit of perfection (Critique of Practical Reason Dialectic IV; cf. Metaphysical Principles of Virtue I 22).

8. Conclusion

This paper has tried to make clear what a rich resource of ideas we have in Gregory of Nyssa. What is also of great historical interest is Gregory's pivotal role in the development of Western consciousness. Gregory takes numerous ideas from the Judaeo-Christian, particularly Philonian-Origenist, tradition and from the pagan Middle Platonist and Neoplatonist schools, digests them into a very original synthesis and in expounding that synthesis develops ideas that anticipate later Byzantine thinkers such as the Pseudo-Dionysius and Gregory Palamas. Not only that, but several of Gregory's most important theories bear some resemblance to modern thinkers such as John Locke and Immanuel Kant (though through what channels of transmission, if any, is unclear--perhaps John Scotus Eriugena (c. 810 - c. 877), who quotes him extensively, and the Cambridge Platonists of the seventeenth century). Given all that, and given Gregory's relative absence from most standard treatments of Western thought, I think may be fair to say that Gregory of Nyssa is one of the most under-appreciated figures in Western intellectual history.

9. References and Further Reading

a. Greek Texts

  • Gregor von Nyssa: Aus einem Briefe an Xenodorus. In Analecta Patristica: Texte und Abhandlungen der Griechischen Patristik, edited by Franz Diekamp, pp. 13 - 15. Orientalia Christiana Analecta 177. Rome: Pontificium Institutum Orientalium Studiorum, 1938.
    • This is the source for an important fragment discussing Gregory's concept of "energies."
  • Gregorii Nysseni Opera. Edited by Werner Jaeger, et al. Leiden: Brill, 1960 - 1998.
    • This critical edition of Gregory's works is rapidly replacing the much older Migne edition. However the edition has not yet been completed.
  • Patrologia Graeca, vols. 44 - 46. Edited by J. P. Migne. Paris: Migne, 1857 - 1866.
    • In the above citations I have placed page references to the Migne edition (which is still the only complete edition of Gregory's works) in brackets.

b. Translations

  • From Glory to Glory: Texts from Gregory of Nyssa's Mystical Writings. Edited by Jean Danielou. Crestwood: St. Vladimir's Seminary Press, 1997.Gregory of Nyssa: Homilies on Ecclesiastes. Translated by Stuart G. Hall and Rachel Moriarty. Proceedings of the Seventh International Colloquium on Gregory of Nyssa. Berlin: Walter de Gruyter, 1993.
  • Life of Moses. Translated by Abraham J. Malherbe and Everett Ferguson. Classics of Western Spirituality. New York: Paulist Press, 1978.
  • On the Inscriptions of the Psalms. Translated by Ronald E. Heine. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1995.
  • Saint Gregory of Nyssa: Ascetical Works. Translated by Virginia W. Callahan. The Fathers of the Church, vol. 58. Washington: Catholic University Press, 1967.
  • Saint Gregory of Nyssa: Commentary on the Song of Songs. Translated by Casimir McCambley. Archbishop Iakovos Library of Ecclesiastical and Historical Sources, no. 12. Brookline: Hellenic College Press, 1987.
  • Select Writings and Letters of Gregory, Bishop of Nyssa. Translated by William Moore and Henry A. Wilson. A Select Library of Nicene and Post-Nicene Fathers of the Christian Church, 2d series, vol. 5. Grand Rapids: Eerdmans, 1954. Note that Book II of Against Eunomius in this edition is now regarded as Book IV (usually referred to under various titles as a separate work), Books III - XII are now regarded as Sections 1 - 10 of Book III, and the "Answer to Eunomius' Second Book" is now regarded as Book II.
  • St. Gregory of Nyssa: The Soul and the Resurrection. Translated by Catharine P. Roth. Crestwood: St. Vladimir's Seminary Press, 1993.
  • The Lord's Prayer, The Beatitudes. Translated by Hilda C. Graef. Ancient Christian Writers, vol. 18. New York: Newman Press, 1954.

c. Secondary Sources

  • Balas, David L. Metousia Theou: Man's Participation in God's Perfections according to Saint Gregory of Nyssa. Rome: Pontificium Institutum Sancti Anselmi, 1966.Balthasar, Hans Urs von. Presence and Thought: An Essay on the Religious Philosophy of Gregory of Nyssa. San Francisco: Ignatius Press, 1995.
  • Barnes, Michel Rene. The Power of God: Dunamis in Gregory of Nyssa's Trinitarian Theology. Washington: Catholic University Press, 2001.
  • Callahan, J. F. "Greek Philosophy and the Cappadocian Cosmology." Dumbarton Oaks Papers 12 (1958): 30 - 57.
  • Cherniss, Harold Fredrik. The Platonism of Gregory of Nyssa. New York: Lenox Hill Publishers, 1971.
  • Coakley, Sarah, ed. Re-Thinking Gregory of Nyssa. Oxford: Blackwell Publishing, 2003.
  • Harrison, Verna E. F. Grace and Human Freedom According to St. Gregory of Nyssa. Lewiston: Edwin Mellen Press, 1992.
  • Heine, Ronald E. "Gregory of Nyssa's Apology for Allegory." Vigiliae Christianae 38 (1984): 360 - 370.
  • Jaeger, Werner. Two Rediscovered Works of Ancient Christian Literature: Gregory of Nyssa and Macarius. Leiden: E. J. Brill, 1954.
  • Keenan, Mary Emily. "De Professione Christiana and De Perfectione: A Study of the Ascetical Doctrine of Saint Gregory of Nyssa." Dumbarton Oaks Papers 5 (1950): 167 - 207.
  • Ladner, Gerhart D. "The Philosophical Anthropology of Saint Gregory of Nyssa." Dumbarton Oaks Papers 12 (1958): 59 - 94.
  • Lossky, Vladimir. The Vision of God. Crestwood: St. Vladimir's Seminary Press, 1983.
  • Louth, Andrew. The Origins of the Christian Mystical Tradition: From Plato to Denys. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1981.
  • Meredith, Anthony. Gregory of Nyssa. London: Routledge, 1999.
  • Meredith, Anthony. The Cappadocians. Crestwood: St. Vladimir's Seminary Press, 1995.
  • Moutsoulas, Elias D. The Incarnation of the Word and the Theosis of Man According to the Teaching of Gregory of Nyssa. Athens: Elias D. Moutsoulas, 2000.
  • Pelikan, Jaroslav. Christianity and Classical Culture: The Metamorphosis of Natural Theology in the Christian Encounter with Hellenism. New Haven: Yale University Press, 1993.
  • Otis, Brooks. "Cappadocian Thought as a Coherent System." Dumbarton Oaks Papers 12 (1958): 96 - 124.
  • Stramara, Daniel F. "Gregory of Nyssa: An Ardent Abolitionist?" St. Vladimir's Theological Quarterly. 41 (1997): 37 - 69.
  • Weiswurm, Alcuin A. The Nature of Human Knowledge According to Saint Gregory of Nyssa. Washington: Catholic University Press, 1952.

Author Information

Donald L. Ross
Georgetown University

U. S. A.

Jane Addams (1860—1935)

addamsJane Addams was an activist and prolific writer in the American Pragmatist tradition who became a nationally recognized leader of Progressivism in the United States as well as an internationally renowned peace advocate. Addams is primarily acclaimed for founding the Chicago social settlement, Hull-House, which emerged as the flagship of the Settlement Movement. Hull-House provided Addams with a supportive intellectual community and a basis for understanding urban life amidst rapid immigrant influx. Together with other Hull-House residents, Addams undertook a number of local, state, national and ultimately international activist projects including garbage collection, adult education, child labor reform, labor union support, women’s suffrage and peace advocacy among others. Her personal accomplishments are staggering and are recounted in a number of contemporary biographies. Addams helped to found the National Association for the Advancement of Colored People, the American Civil Liberties Union and the Women’s International League for Peace and Freedom. In 1931, she was awarded the Nobel Peace Prize.

Addams’ achievements as a social reformer represent a prodigious legacy but she also left a significant intellectual heritage. She authored a dozen books and over 500 articles of original social philosophy as recognized by her contemporaries including John Dewey, William James, and George Herbert Mead. The organizing principle of her social philosophy was progress. To this end, Addams understood democracy as both a form of socially engaged living and as a framework for social morality. Accordingly, authentic social advancement should be democratic or what she termed “lateral progress,” an inclusive advancement not just narrowly applied to the privileged. Addams argued that fostering the moral relations necessary for a robust democracy required community members to engage in “sympathetic knowledge,” an approach to learning about one another for the purpose of caring and acting on one another’s behalf. Addams’ writings emphasize direct experience, pluralism and fallibility in the engagement with concrete social issues. Although the works of male philosophers such as Dewey, Peirce, James and Mead dominate the literature of classic American pragmatism, the writings of Jane Addams provide a unique and provocative feminist pragmatist voice.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Social Philosophy
    1. Sympathetic Knowledge
    2. Lateral Progress
    3. Pluralism
    4. Democracy
    5. Fallibilism
  3. Themes
    1. Peace
    2. Education
    3. Women’s Advancement
    4. Economics
  4. Philosophical Legacy
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Literature
      1. Books
      2. Selected Articles
      3. Collections
    2. Secondary Literature
    3. Biographies

1. Biography

Laura Jane Addams was born on September 6, 1860 in Cedarville, Illinois, ten months after the publication of Darwin’s Origin of The Species, two months prior to the election of Abraham Lincoln to the presidency of the United States and seven months prior to the secession of the South from the Union. Addams recounts her early life in Twenty Years at Hull-House, the only one of her works to continuously remain in print since it was first published in 1910. As a child she was called “Jennie” but her childhood had a turbulent beginning. When Jennie was two, her mother, Sarah, died whilst giving birth to her ninth child. As a result, Addams formed a significant bond with her father, John, who was a successful mill owner and politician. John Addams corresponded with Lincoln, and Jane Addams associated her father and Lincoln as moral icons and personal inspirations throughout her life. The relationship between John and his daughter was important because it afforded Jane the attention of an educated and worldly adult, an opportunity not experienced by many young women of this era. John Addams remarried but there was always a special bond between Jane and he.

John Addams sent his daughter to college at the Rockford Female Seminary (later Rockford College). Although Addams was always a good student, she blossomed in college and became a widely acknowledged campus leader. Addams learned how valuable a supportive female community could be given women’s exclusion from most activities in the public sphere. She later replicated the woman-centered atmosphere at Hull-House. When Addams graduated from college in 1881, she intended to pursue a medical career, but after a short tine in graduate school, she decided that medicine was not in her future. The death of her father in that same year placed her life in turmoil. Having lost direction in her life, she fell into a decade-long phase of soul searching, combined with sporadic health problems. During this period she undertook several trips to Europe. On her second trip, she encountered the pioneering social settlement, Toynbee Hall in London. Toynbee Hall provided young men an opportunity to work to improve the lives of impoverished Londoners. Soon after this encounter Addams developed a plan to start a social settlement in the United States.

Addams enlisted the help of her friend Ellen Gates Starr in her noble scheme. Starr had briefly attended Rockford College with Addams, so they shared an understanding of the empowerment that a female community could provide to its residents. Addams and Starr open the Hull-House settlement in 1889 in the heart of a run-down neighborhood on the west side of Chicago. They began with few plans, few resources and few residents but with a desire to be good neighbors to the community. Working with the network of women’s organizations in Chicago, the number of Hull-House projects quickly grew, as did their reputation. Women, and to a lesser extent men, came from all over the country to live and work as part of this progressive experiment in communal living combined with social activism. Under Addams’ leadership, Hull-House opened a public bathhouse, undertook a campaign to have the garbage collected, started a kindergarten, developed the first playground in Chicago and responded to a variety of community needs. At first, Addams had rented the entire second floor and the first floor drawing room of the Hull-House building but eventually the settlement complex grew to accommodate one full city block. Addams faced an ongoing challenge to explain the work Hull-House had undertaken. People often felt compelled to give settlement projects the familiar label of charity work, but Addams rebuffed this claim. As she explained in her 1893 article, “The Objective Value of the Social Settlement,” Addams viewed Hull-House residents as engaged in reciprocal knowledge work: the collection, analysis and dissemination of information combined with intelligent action.

Addams was an effective activist and organizer but she was also keenly attuned to social theory. As a child she had read widely, largely influenced by her father who housed the town library in their home. At Rockford, she was exposed to Ancient Greek philosophy as well as the social theories of the Romantics, John Ruskin and Thomas Carlyle. At Hull-House, Addams attracted the attention of John Dewey, William James and George Herbert Mead, each of whom visited and engaged Addams in lively conversations that proved to be mutually influencing. Given this intellectual foundation, Addams used her Hull-House experience as a springboard for developing public philosophy in the American Pragmatist Tradition. In 1899, ten years after founding Hull-House, Addams published, “The Function of the Social Settlement” in which she placed her progressive activities in epistemological terms. Addams viewed issues of knowledge as the most profound contemporary challenge. Social settlements were an active effort to learn about one another across class and cultural divides thus building collective knowledge about the individuals who make up this diverse society. In this manner, Hull-House served as a multi-directional conduit of information about human lives: Addams and her cohorts helped immigrants learn how to navigate the complex American culture while Addams communicated and thematized her experience with immigrants to help white, upper and middle class America understand what it meant to be poor and displaced. Furthermore, Addams viewed this knowledge creation as reciprocal: society benefited from the knowledge that immigrants brought and the immigrants benefited from learning about their new neighbors. Addams was unique in recognizing that immigrants could contribute to American culture.

Addams authored or co-authored a dozen books and over 500 articles after she founded Hull-House. The articles appeared in both scholarly and popular periodicals, establishing Addams as a public philosopher and social leader. Addams was also a much in-demand speaker and she traveled nationally and internationally to make presentations that supported her progressive values. Addams was one of the few women of the era to transgress the private sphere to successfully influence the public sphere. Polls indicate that Addams became one of the most recognized and admired figures in the United States. She was an influential catalyst for change, lending her name and organizing skills to a variety of causes. Addams worked with W.E.B. DuBois in support of a number of African-American endeavors including writing articles for his publication The Crisis and helping to found the National Association for the Advancement of Colored People. She helped start the American Civil Liberties Union and organized the Women’s International League for Peace and Freedom. Her tireless effort in support of peace led to Addams receiving the 1931 Nobel Peace prize. Addams died of cancer on May 21, 1935. The public memorial at Hull-House filled the streets with mourners and eulogies were published in newspapers nationally and internationally.

2. Social Philosophy

There are a number of reasons why Addams was not generally recognized as a philosopher until the late twentieth century which include her gender and her association with social work. Another factor in this lack of recognition is that she was not a systematic philosopher either stylistically or methodologically. Addams’ writing style is not typical of the philosophic tradition in that it lacks a sustained abstract character. For example, in Democracy and Social Ethics, arguably the most philosophical of Addams’ books, the chapters address charity workers, family relationships, domestic workers, industrial working conditions, educational methods and political reforms. To the trained philosopher, these topics appear far removed from more familiar considerations of epistemology, metaphysics and ethics. However, a careful examination of her work reveals that Addams begins with social phenomena and draws theoretical inference from these experiences. In Democracy and Social Ethics, Addams offers intriguing, even radical, insights into the nature of ethics and epistemology. To read Addams as a philosopher requires setting aside assumptions about beginning from abstract theoretical positions. As a pragmatist, Addams is strictly interested in social philosophy. Everything she writes seeks what James would refer to as the “cash value” of an idea for social growth and improvement. Four interrelated cornerstones of her social philosophy are the concepts of sympathetic knowledge, lateral progress, pluralism and fallibilism.

a. Sympathetic Knowledge

Beginning with her first book, Democracy and Social Ethics and running through all of her works addressing social issues is the notion of sympathetic knowledge. Fundamentally, sympathetic knowledge is the idea that humans can learn about one another in terms that move beyond propositional knowledge, that is rather than merely learning facts, knowledge is gained through openness to disruptive knowledge. Knowledge can be disruptive in the sense that new information can transform one’s perceived experience and understanding. This idea motivated Addams and the residents of Hull-House to undertake the first urban study of racial demographics, which was published as Hull-House Maps and Papers in 1895. Addams integrated epistemological inquiry with ethical analysis such that it was the responsibility of members of a society to know one another better for the purposes of caring and acting on one another’s behalf. Sympathetic knowledge is Addams’ rationale behind social settlements. By providing a physical location where people of different backgrounds could meet, social knowledge is built up reducing the abstraction of distant others transforming them into concrete, known others. Accordingly, Addams suggests that the many social activities sponsored by Hull-House—clubs, dances, performances, athletics—were not frivolous affairs but a means for breaking down barriers between people, thus fostering sympathetic knowledge. In Twenty Years at Hull-House and later in The Second Twenty Years at Hull-House, Addams claims that these social activities performed an educative function and that social settlements were in fact thoroughly educative projects. Like Dewey, Addams valued education as the foundation of a healthy democratic society. Like Mead, Addams viewed “play” as an essential aspect of education because of its ability to fire the imagination. Addams takes this notion so far as to argue that play is important for a vibrant democracy because it creates the possibility of empathetic imagination. When one plays, one takes on the roles of others and through fictitious inhabitation of these positions begins to empathize with the plight of others. In this manner, education also contributes to sympathetic knowledge. Similarly, literature and drama can enhance sympathetic knowledge as one empathizes with fictitious characters. Accordingly, Hull-House sponsored community theater as well as the reading of novels.

The basis of sympathetic knowledge is experience that is imaginatively extrapolated. When Addams addresses prostitution in A New Conscience and an Ancient Evil, she employs anecdotes from the Hull-House community to allow her audience to understand the struggles of young women in the big cities. In this manner, she is neither strictly deontological nor teleological in her moral approach. Rather than dealing with principles of sexuality, for example, or the consequences of prostitution on society, although both considerations are important, Addams begins by attempting to increase knowledge of marginalized women. Inherent in this approach to human ontology is a belief in the fundamental goodness and relationality of people. Addams believes that if her audience understands what is going on in the lives of others, even if those others are outcasts, then we may begin to care and possibly take positive action on their behalf. Addams’ method of sympathetic knowledge extends to those with whom she disagreed. For example, in Democracy and Social Ethics, Addams describes her failed political battles with local ward alderman, Johnny Powers (who Addams does not name in print). Hull-House sponsored a number of unsuccessful attempts to unseat Powers. Rather than excoriate Powers for his backroom deals and bribery, Addams set out to understand what made such an alderman popular. Through this method of inquiry, Addams, although not altering her denunciation of Powers’ cronyism, began to understand how the people of the ward appreciated an alderman who was visible and connected to their everyday lives. For Addams, sympathetic knowledge, despite its emotive implications, was a rational attempt to understand others. Accordingly, Addams eschewed antagonism. Ad hominem attacks only foster defensive barriers so Addams employed sympathetic knowledge in what she described as a detached manner. Such an approach might seem counter intuitive, but is understandable for a figure like Addams who bridged the reserved nature of the Victorian era and the moral commitment of the Progressive era.

b. Lateral Progress

Given her status as one of the leading figures of the progressive era, it is not surprising that Addams advocated social progress, but she distinguished the particular type of progress she advocated. The industrial revolution had seen many people prosper in the name of economic and technological progress. In addition, Addams had grown up in the post-Civil War era where social progress had been attributed to the newfound rights of African-Americans. Addams, however, viewed such progress to be more abstract than concrete. In the case of economic progress, it was experienced mostly by an elite few with some benefits trickling down to the middle class. From her perspective at Hull-House, she witnessed the inability of immigrants to fully participate in the economy or the political process. Similarly, she saw that although African-Americans ostensibly had legal rights, they often were prevented from actualizing those rights through a combination of laws intended to circumvent equality and racism in social relations. Given these experiences, Addams advocated what she referred to as “lateral progress,” or the idea that for authentic progress to take place, it would have to be experienced in a widespread manner rather than by a privileged few. Furthermore, Addams’ notion of lateral progress was not to be enforced hierarchically from structures of authority. Addams envisioned a progress that was derived from participatory democratic processes.

Addams applied the concept of lateral progress to a number of social issues. When it came to women’s suffrage, for example, Addams did not base her arguments upon principles of equality or fairness. Instead, she argued that such a move represented lateral progress, the inclusion of all—including women—would lead to the betterment of society. Similarly, her support of labor unions was tempered by the notion of lateral progress. Addams did not advocate for collective bargaining merely to benefit those fortunate enough to be in the unions; she viewed labor unions as working toward lateral progress by improving wages, hours and working conditions for all workers.

c. Pluralism

Addams argued for the inclusion of all members of society in the institution, policies and practices that were to lead to social progress. For example, in a 1930 article, “Widening the Circle of Enlightenment” Addams contends that pluralism has an energizing impact on society and should be embraced rather than feared. In this manner, Addams was an early American theorist who saw the value of diversity. Addams suggested that by bringing their cultural heritage to the United States, immigrants kept America from becoming static. Reciprocally, immigrants benefited from engaging in the cultural heritage found in North America. For Addams, social progress demanded that all voices be heard but she believed in the power of collective intelligence to find common cause from that diversity.

Addams’ valorization of cultural diversity was so thoroughgoing that she integrated it into her pacifist arguments. In Newer Ideals of Peace, Addams contends that cosmopolitan cities are a model for international peace. While not romanticizing the conflicts between groups that occur in the city, Addams draws on numerous experiences of people from different cultural heritages setting aside their differences to develop working relationships and help one another survive the challenges of urban life. Addams believed that if diverse people under the strain of Chicago’s urban blight could find a way to work together, then countries in the international community could also come to some equilibrium without violence.

Addams applied her pluralistic commitment to intellectual understanding. Hull-House welcomed speakers from a variety of political positions, whether the residents agreed with those positions or not. To foster this openness, Addams eschewed ideological ties for herself and for the Hull-House community. In this manner, although she was sympathetic to many of the arguments of socialists, anarchists, feminists and various Christian leaders, she never entirely accepted any ideological position. Demonstrating her pragmatism, she avoided political labels but variously aligned herself when it meant advancing the cause of social progress. On many occasions, Addams and Hull-House were criticized for not clearly associating themselves with an ideological camp.

d. Democracy

Addams maintained a robust definition of democracy that moved far beyond understanding it merely as a political structure. For Addams, democracy represented both a mode of living and a social morality. She viewed democracy as an acknowledgement that the lives of citizens are bound up with one another and this relationship creates a duty to understand the struggles and circumstances of fellow citizens. Reciprocity of social relations is crucial for providing citizens with the empathetic foundation necessary to energize democracy. Social settlements were experiments in the kind of democracy that Addams endeavored to promote: one of active social engagement. Addams’ definition of democracy becomes clearest in Democracy and Social Ethics where she makes two equivalencies clear. One, moral theory in the modern age must emphasize social ethics. Two, for Addams, democracy is social ethics.

Addams metaphorically described democracy as a dynamic organism that must grow with changing times in order to remain vital. In Newer Ideals of Peace, Addams goes so far as to suggest that it was time that the United States’ political institutions and morality progressed. She argued that America’s founders, whom she admired, developed the Bill of Rights based upon an individual sense of morality appropriate for their era. However, Addams viewed social morality as the appropriate response to the contemporary rise of big cities along with the improvements in technology and transportation that brought so many people together. The time had come to emphasize the social relations necessary for a vibrant democracy under the current historical circumstances. Some commentators describe Addams as advocating a “social democracy,” one that emphasizes a way of being over the political structure. Addams’ valorization of democracy did not entail a static object of affection. She wanted democracy to grow and flourish which required ongoing conversation and change. In this manner, Addams never conflated her love of democracy with unabashed patriotism. Also in Newer Ideals of Peace, Addams develops the notion of “cosmic patriotism,” arguing that one’s commitment to humanity must exceed national borders.

e. Fallibilism

Another aspect of Addams’ work that differentiates it from traditional philosophic literature is its humility. Employing the experimental method of American Pragmatists, Addams described numerous ventures undertaken by the Hull-House community in the name of fostering sympathetic knowledge or lateral progress. However, Addams was not afraid to recount her errors in these efforts. For Addams, mistakes are opportunities for growth and are worth the risk of active engagement. In the process of crossing class and cultural boundaries—moving from the familiar to the unfamiliar—there are bound to be mistakes made, but if they are done in the spirit of care and with humility, then the errors are not insurmountable and have the potential to be great teachers. Time and again, the upper class, college-educated, white women who predominated the Hull-House community demonstrated their lack of cultural sensitivity only to provide Addams with an anecdote for further social analysis and an opportunity to learn from the errors. Mistakes were merely part of the pragmatist cycle of action and reflection.

Twenty Years at Hull-House recounts many of Addams’ mistakes. For example, when Starr and Addams first established the settlement, they furnished Hull-House with the trappings of the high culture with which they were familiar. Addams later regretted this approach and recognized the class alienation that fine furniture, draperies and artwork foster. She later has these items removed for simpler furnishings. In another anecdote from Twenty Years at Hull-House, Addams oversees the construction of a coffee house at Hull-House to provide working immigrants with a place to purchase nutritious food without the temptation of alcohol, as was available at local saloons. Despite bringing in modern equipment and using the latest techniques in economical and healthy food production, the coffee house proved unpopular, even with Hull-House residents. Addams came to realize that their paternalism had prevailed, once again alienating their community. Eventually, they made adjustments in the menu to local tastes and the coffee house became another successful part of the Hull-House complex, although more for its contribution to socializing than the cuisine it provided. What is interesting about these anecdotes is that Addams does not attempt to hide or put a positive spin on them. Out of sensitivity for misrepresenting the interests and positions of her neighbors, Addams describes the practice of bringing Hull-House neighbors to her presentations so that she would not be viewed simply as the outside expert attesting to her findings. In this way, mistakes served to improve her practices.

3. Themes

Addams’ pragmatist philosophy integrated experience with theory in an ongoing and dynamic dance that makes it inappropriate to separate her theories from the social issues in which she engaged. This is part of the reason that Addams’ work appears alien to those steeped in the Western tradition of philosophy, which attempts to lay claim to universal truths. Addams makes use of what feminist philosophers have described as “standpoint epistemology,” acknowledging that her philosophy is derived from a particular social, political and historical position. Her theoretical work flowed from working out tangible social issues of her day, and yet many of her themes and conclusions remain relevant for the present.

a. Peace

Perhaps no other issue took more of Addams’ time and attention in the latter part of her public career than did peace. Besides dozens of articles, she authored two books, Newer Ideals of Peace and Peace and Bread in Time of War, she also co-authored Women at The Hague, all books that directly address issues of peace. In addition, many of her other books such as The Long Road of Women’s Memory, The Second Twenty Years at Hull-House, and My Friend, Julia Lathrop have at least a chapter dedicated to issues of peace. While Addams avoided ideological positions, she came closest when it came to pacifism. Nevertheless, she never invoked a universal principle such as declaring all war as immoral, however she did contend that violent conflict was regressive, wasteful and provided the possibility of further violence in society.

In Newer Ideals of Peace, Addams made it clear that she saw peace as more than the absence of war. For Addams, peace represented an opportunity for social progress because people were capable of working together to achieve social goals. Like many in the late nineteenth century, Addams viewed social evolution as progressing toward greater peaceful relations and social harmony. Collective peace was tied to individual peaceful relations such that communal activism represented peace efforts. For example, helping immigrants thrive in the United States was an act of peace. In this manner, given her commitment to democratic social progress achieved through collective engagement in an effort to foster sympathetic knowledge, Addams extrapolated that war is socially regressive. Armed conflict ends rational and dispassionate conversations impeding the agreement necessary for social growth. War makes opposing human beings into ultimate others—someone so alien that it is possible to kill them—creating the antithesis of sympathetic knowledge.

Addams resisted compartmentalizing her moral philosophy, and she extended this to her ideas about peace. Rather than merely offering a direct normative assessment of militarism, Addams casts a wider net to address variables less causally related to a particular conflict. In “Democracy or Militarism,” written in the context of the Spanish-American War, Addams indicates that society is at a crossroads. According to Addams, to accept militaristic actions as a part of international politics is to normalize brutalization that makes further violence acceptable. To support her claim, she cites instances of increased social violence that can be tied, albeit loosely, to the formal acceptance of war. Furthermore, Addams identifies the gender dimension of increased militarism. In “War Times Changing Women’s Traditions,” Addams resists traditional notions of chivalry and romanticism to claim that the ostensible argument for the violent protection of women can only lead women to a vulnerable position in a society where violence is normalized.

Addams was not merely a social critic. Her social philosophy often included alternative plans of action—not fixed solutions but flexible and revisable outcomes. Addams, like William James, suggests that militarism has been ennobled in cultural traditions and that an ennobling substitute was needed to fire the same kind of dedication. In Newer Ideals of Peace, Addams offers social activism as the cause that should be rallied around. Addams challenges her readers to imagine heroism in the work of social activists to improve urban life.

Her staunch philosophy of pacifism brought Addams a great amount of personal criticism during her public career. Although many of her contemporaries, like Dewey, would support the United States’ entry into World War I, Addams did not. Her popularity suffered greatly and she faced some of her harshest rebukes as national emotions peaked prior to the onset of war. More significantly, World War I signaled a changing tide for progressivism. Political realism came to the fore, and Addams’ ideals of peace suddenly became culturally archaic. The post World War I period saw the number of social settlements dwindle and American Pragmatism experienced an extended hibernation.

b. Education

Addams viewed lifelong education as a critical component of an engaged citizenry in a vibrant democracy. To that end, Hull-House sponsored a myriad of educational projects. Addams strived to improve childhood education by working for legislation to reduce child labor, she sponsored a kindergarten at Hull-House and worked with Dewey and education pioneer Ella Flagg Young on pedagogical techniques centered upon making education more relevant for students. Extant descriptions by visitors to Hull-house describe it as permeated by children furiously involved in a myriad of activities.

In the early twentieth century, adolescence was a largely overlooked period of human development and on the occasions when young adulthood was addressed at all, it was usually conceived of as a problem. Addams, who often directed her philosophical analysis to marginalized sectors of society, took a particular interest in adolescence. In what she described as her favorite book, The Spirit of Youth and the City Streets, Addams offers an extended study of the plight of young people and through her Hull-House experiences explains to her readers the needs and challenges of this age. Accordingly, Hull-House sponsored a number of programs for adolescents including social gatherings, athletics and drama. Hull-House engaged in pioneering programs for young women’s sports and physical activity, defying social norms that claimed that exercise was inappropriate for women.

Addams’ commitment to lifelong education resulted in pioneering work in adult education. Hull-House sponsored college extension courses as well as a variety of educational opportunities for adults in the community including lectures and clubs. For example, The Plato Club offered weekly readings and discussions on philosophy, where Dewey sometimes lectured, and The Working People Social Science Club provided an opportunity for discussions of social and political philosophy. Some commentators have claimed that Hull-House was the birthplace of adult education. In The Second Twenty Years at Hull-House, Addams describes developing particular pedagogical techniques adapted for adult students including the need for a peer-level social atmosphere and the use of news events as an opportunity for learning.

c. Women’s Advancement

Addams eschewed ideological labels including that of feminist, nevertheless she was clearly aligned with the feminist movement. She advocated for women’s suffrage and took a leadership role as the Vice-President of the National American Woman Suffrage Association from 1911-1914. Consistent with her notion of lateral progress, Addams’ support for women’s advancement was framed in terms of social progress rather than principles of equality or merely advocating for an oppressed constituency. Addams contended that women brought an alternative perspective to politics and given her commitment to pluralism, alternative perspectives could only strengthen society. For example, in “If Men Were Seeking The Elective Franchise,” Addams parodies the plight of women by commenting on men’s foibles in a manner that mimicked the way men spoke of the reasons women should not be given elective franchise. She accused men of being quarrelsome as well as exhibiting misplaced values in preferring to spend money on armaments than on domestic welfare. Accordingly, Addams is sometimes accused of being a gender essentialist in the language she employed about the nature of men and women.

Addams undertook numerous projects with the empowerment of women as a goal. Hull-House itself was a unique woman-centered project. There were male residents but it was always clear that the leadership and culture of Hull-House were decidedly female. Hull-House supported immigrant mothers in their roles as primary care givers and even took the radical step of disseminating birth control information. One example of Addams’ concern for women can be seen in the creation of the Jane Club, described inTwenty Years at Hull-House. At a time when collective bargaining did not enjoy the legal protections that it does today, Addams observed that women labor union members were particularly vulnerable when it came to periods of unemployment created by strikes or lockouts. When such actions took place, single women could no longer afford rent money. This vulnerability reduced the power of the bargaining unit. Working with women labor leaders such as Mary Kenney, Addams established a workingwoman’s cooperative named the Jane Club. This cooperative ensured that all members’ rent was paid in the event of labor interruptions. Addams eventually secured funding to build housing for the Jane Club but it operated as an independent entity.

Given their commitments to pluralism, classical American philosophers have been generally more sympathetic to the plight of women than many other genres of philosophers, but Addams further sensitized their thought. Contemporary philosopher Charlene Haddock Seigfried coined the term “pragmatist feminism” to describe the fruitful intersection of American philosophy and feminist theory. Seigfried’s quintessential example of a pragmatist feminist was Jane Addams.

d. Economics

Although Addams did not write a book-length work on economics, comment on economic issues permeates her writings. Addams had much in common with socialist analysis, which was particularly popular in this rocky period of American economics. She knew and supported Eugene Debs, and engaged a number of socialist intellectuals in discussions. Given her pursuit of lateral progress, her affinity for socialism is understandable, but Addams’ aversion to antagonism did not allow her to accept the social upheaval espoused in much of the socialist rhetoric. Addams’ support of labor unions exemplified her socialistic leanings. In the formative years of labor organizing, there was a widespread belief that collective bargaining was a mediating step toward a social transformation where eventually greater control of the means of production would be gained by laborers. Addams viewed the amelioration of class differences as representing social progress and therefore supported unionization.

As a result of the Pullman Strike of 1894, Addams became involved in issues of union management relations. Although it was only five years after the opening of Hull-House, Addams had already garnered a public reputation for skilled negotiating and was enlisted to engage in mediation between railroad car workers and George Pullman, the staunch patriarch of the Pullman Palace Car Company and one of the richest men in America. Addams ultimately played a negligible role in the strike because Pullman refused to meet with her. The labor negotiation foundered and the strike ended quickly and painfully for the workers. Addams’ most important contribution was in constructing the legacy of the Pullman strike. Addams penned an eloquent and reflective account of the strike, “A Modern Lear,” in which she compared George Pullman to Shakespeare’s tragic figure, King Lear. It took nearly twenty years for “A Modern Lear” to be printed, as publishers shunned Addams’ critical analysis. Utilizing a process of sympathetic knowledge, Addams does not describe clear-cut heroes and villains in the Pullman strike, but characterizes Pullman as disconnected from his workers, much like King Lear was alienated from his daughter. For Addams, this illustrated the danger of capitalism, that economic barriers isolated people from one another. In a philosophy advocating an engaged society, such barriers retarded progress.

4. Philosophical Legacy

Although Addams has not always been included in the canon of classical American philosophy, her contemporaries, including John Dewey, William James and George Herbert Mead, publicly acknowledged Addams’ influence on their thinking. Therefore, in addition to her own corpus of work, Addams’ intellectual legacy can be found in their philosophy. Nevertheless, for much of the twentieth century, Addams was considered unoriginal and her writing was thought to be derivative of other thinkers. In the 1990’s, a renewed interest in Addams’ theoretical work developed from the feminist practice of revisiting historical boundaries that traditionally limited philosophical qualification. At the turn of the twenty-first century, Addams’ major works have come back in to print and a number of intellectual biographies have reconsidered Addams’ intellectual legacy.

In many ways, Addams took American pragmatism to a logical conclusion: social action. Pragmatists emphasize the dynamic relationship of experience and theory in the service of social advancement. Dewey, James and Mead engaged in social projects from university settings. Addams, who never had an official university appointment, although she did teach occasionally at the University of Chicago, took pragmatist theory out into society and applied it to her projects. However, in the process, she never stopped writing and thematizing her experiences, thus revising and reconsidering her theories. In this manner Addams provides one model of what it is to be a public philosopher.

5. References and Further Reading

a Primary Literature

i. Books

  • Addams, Jane. Democracy and Social Ethics. 1902. Urbana, IL: University of Illinois Press, 2002. Addams’ most recognizable philosophical work. Of particular importance is the Introduction where she sets forth her concept of sympathetic knowledge.
  • Addams, Jane. Newer Ideals of Peace, New York: Macmillan, 1906. Addams extends the concept of peace to more than the absence of war.
  • Addams, Jane. The Spirit of Youth and the City Streets. 1909. Urbana, IL: University of Illinois Press, 1972. Addams breaks new ground by addressing the overlooked age of adolescence and describes youth in positive terms rather than the negative terms typical of the era.
  • Addams, Jane. Twenty Years at Hull House. 1910. Urbana, IL: University of Illinois Press, 1990. Best work to start a study of Addams. Opening chapters are autobiographical and then the book addresses the first two decades of the Hull-House community.
  • Addams, Jane. A New Conscience and an Ancient Evil. 1912. Urbana, IL: University of Illinois Press, 2002. Addams addresses prostitution using a pragmatist approach that incorporates an analysis of many variables.
  • Addams, Jane. The Long Road of Woman’s Memory. 1916. Urbana, IL: University of Illinois Press, 2002. Once again focusing upon a marginalized social group, Addams explores the depth of the memories of elderly immigrant women. Includes the intriguing story of the Devil Baby.
  • Addams, Jane. Peace and Bread in Time of War. 1922. Urbana, IL: University of Illinois Press, 2002. Written after World War I, this work is less optimistic than Newer Ideal of Peace but addresses issues of patriotism and dissent in time of war.
  • Addams, Jane. Second Twenty Years at Hull House. New York: Macmillan, 1930. Addams addresses a variety of topics related to projects at Hull-House.
  • Addams, Jane. The Excellent Becomes the Permanent. New York: Macmillan, 1932. A unique text where Addams eulogizes twelve people including herself. Addams concludes by addressing issues of art, imagination, and memory.
  • Addams, Jane. My Friend, Julia Lathrop. 1935. Urbana, IL: University of Illinois Press, 2004. Her last book-length work, Addams provides a biography of long time Hull-House resident, Julia Lathrop who went on to be the first woman head of a Federal agency (The Women’s Bureau). Although a biography of someone else, this work reveals a great deal about Addams’ values and philosophy.
  • Addams, Jane, Emily G. Balch and Alice Hamilton. Women at The Hague: The International Congress Of Women And Its Results.1915. Urbana, IL: University of Illinois Press, 2003. Addams authors two chapters of this intriguing historical account of women organizing to prevent war and offer a means for lasting world peace.
  • Residents of Hull-House. Hull-House Maps and Papers. 1895. New York: Arno Press, Inc., 1970. Groundbreaking study of urban life and demographics in Chicago, which had witnessed an unprecedented influx of migrants from Western and Eastern Europe.

ii. Selected Articles

  • Addams, Jane. “Democracy or Militarism.” 1899. Central Anti-Imperialist League of Chicago, Liberty Tract I.
  • Addams, Jane. “A Function of the Social Settlement.” 1899. Reprinted in Christopher Lasch, Ed. The Social Thought of Jane Addams. Indianapolis: The Bobbs-Merrill Company, Inc., 1965.
  • Addams, Jane. “If Men Were Seeking The Elective Franchise.” 1913. Reprinted in Jean Bethke Elshtain, Ed. Jane Addams and the Dream of American Democracy. New York: Basic Books, 2002.
  • Addams, Jane. “A Modern Lear.” 1912. Reprinted in, Jean Bethke Elshtain, Ed. Jane Addams and the Dream of American Democracy. New York: Basic Books, 2002.
  • Addams, Jane. “The Objective Value of the Social Settlement.” 1893. Reprinted in, Jean Bethke Elshtain, Ed. Jane Addams and the Dream of American Democracy. New York: Basic Books, 2002.
  • Addams, Jane. “The Subjective Necessity for Social Settlements.” 1893. Reprinted in, Jean Bethke Elshtain, Ed. Jane Addams and the Dream of American Democracy. New York: Basic Books, 2002.
  • Addams, Jane. “War Times Changing Women’s Traditions.” 1916. Reprinted in Jane Addams on Peace, War, and International Understanding 1899-1932, ed., Allen F. Davis (New York: Garland Publishing, 1976), 135.
  • Addams, Jane. “Widening the Circle of Enlightenment.” 1930. Journal of Adult Education II, no. 3 (June).

iii. Collections

  • Bryan, Mary Lynn McCree, Barbara Bair, and Maree De Angury. Eds., The Selected Papers of Jane Addams Volume 1: Preparing to Lead, 1860-1881. Urbana, IL: University of Illinois Press, 2003.
  • Condliffe Lagemann, Ellen. Ed., Jane Addams On Education. New Brunswick, NJ: Transaction Publishers, 1994.
  • Cooper Johnson, Emily. Ed., Jane Addams: A Centennial Reader. New York: Macmillan, 1960.
  • Davis, Allen F. Ed., Jane Addams on Peace, War, and International Understanding. New York: Garland Publishing, Inc., 1976.
  • Elshtain, Jean Bethke. Ed., The Jane Addams Reader. New York: Basic Books, 2002.
  • Lasch, Christopher. Ed., The Social Thought of Jane Addams. Indianapolis: The Bobbs-Merrill Company Inc., 1965.

b. Secondary Literature

  • Deegan, Mary Jo. Jane Addams and the Men of the Chicago School, 1892-1918. New Brunswick, NJ: Transaction Books, 1988. Through numerous articles and books, Deegan has spearheaded an effort to have Addams recognized as one of the most important American sociologists.
  • Fischer, Marilyn. On Addams. Wadsworth, 2004. The most concise review of Addams’ philosophy. A handy companion volume to Addams’ writings.
  • Hamington, Maurice. Embodied Care: Jane Addams, Maurice Merleau-Ponty, and Feminist Ethics. Urbana, Il: University of Illinois Press, 2004. Addams’ work conceived as contributing to feminist care ethics.
  • Seigfried, Charlene Haddock, Pragmatism and Feminism: Reweaving the Social Fabric. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1996. Seigfried suggests that pragmatism and feminism have much in common and can benefit from further integration. Addams exemplifies a pragmatist feminist position.

c. Biographies

  • Brown, Victoria Bissell. The Education of Jane Addams. Philadelphia: University of Pennsylvania Press, 2004.
  • Davis, Allen F. American Heroine: The Life and Legend of Jane Addams. London: Oxford, 1973.
  • Diliberto, Gioia. A Useful Woman: The Early Life of Jane Addams. New York: Scribner, 1999.
  • Elshtain, Jean Bethke. Jane Addams and the Dream of American Democracy. New York: Basic Books, 2002.
  • Farrell, John C. Beloved Lady: A History of Jane Addams’ Ideas on Reform and Peace. Baltimore: The John Hopkins Press, 1967.
  • Joslin, Katherine, Jane Addams: A Writer’s Life. Urbana, IL: University of Illinois Press, 2004.
  • Knight, Louise, Citizen: Jane Addams and the Struggle for Democracy. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 2005.
  • Linn, James Weber. Jane Addams: A Biography. Urbana, IL: University of Illinois Press, 2000.

Author Information

Maurice Hamington
Lane Community College
U. S. A.

John Stuart Mill (1806—1873)

millJohn Stuart Mill (1806-1873) profoundly influenced the shape of nineteenth century British thought and political discourse. His substantial corpus of works includes texts in logic, epistemology, economics, social and political philosophy, ethics, metaphysics, religion, and current affairs. Among his most well-known and significant are A System of Logic, Principles of Political Economy, On Liberty, Utilitarianism, The Subjection of Women, Three Essays on Religion, and his Autobiography.Mill’s education at the hands of his imposing father, James Mill, fostered both intellectual development (Greek at the age of three, Latin at eight) and a propensity towards reform. James Mill and Jeremy Bentham led the “Philosophic Radicals,” who advocated for rationalization of the law and legal institutions, universal male suffrage, the use of economic theory in political decision-making, and a politics oriented by human happiness rather than natural rights or conservatism. In his twenties, the younger Mill felt the influence of historicism, French social thought, and Romanticism, in the form of thinkers like Coleridge, the St. Simonians, Thomas Carlyle, Goethe, and Wordsworth. This led him to begin searching for a new philosophic radicalism that would be more sensitive to the limits on reform imposed by culture and history and would emphasize the cultivation of our humanity, including the cultivation of dispositions of feeling and imagination (something he thought had been lacking in his own education).

None of Mill’s major writings remain independent of his moral, political, and social agenda. Even the most abstract works, such as the System of Logic and his Examination of Sir William Hamilton’s Philosophy, serve polemical purposes in the fight against the German, or a priori, school otherwise called “intuitionism.” On Mill’s view, intuitionism needed to be defeated in the realms of logic, mathematics, and philosophy of mind if its pernicious effects in social and political discourse were to be mitigated.

In his writings, Mill argues for a number of controversial principles. He defends radical empiricism in logic and mathematics, suggesting that basic principles of logic and mathematics are generalizations from experience rather than known a priori. The principle of utility—that “actions are right in proportion as they tend to promote happiness; wrong as they tend to produce the reverse of happiness”—was the centerpiece of his ethical philosophy. On Liberty puts forward the “harm principle” that “the only purpose for which power can be rightfully exercised over any member of a civilized community, against his will, is to prevent harm to others.” In The Subjection of Women, he compares the legal status of women to the status of slaves and argues for equality in marriage and under the law.

This article provides an overview of Mill’s life and major works, focusing on his key arguments and their relevant historical contexts.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Works
    1. A System of Logic
      1. Names, Propositions, and the Principles of Logic and Mathematics
      2. Other Topics of Interest
    2. An Examination of Sir William Hamilton’s Philosophy
    3. Psychological Writings
    4. Utilitarianism
      1. History of the Principle of Utility
      2. Basic Argument
    5. On Liberty
    6. The Subjection of Women and Other Social and Political Writings
    7. Principles of Political Economy
    8. Essays on Religion
  3. Conclusion
  4. References and Further Reading

1. Biography

Writing of John Stuart Mill a few days after Mill’s death, Henry Sidgwick claimed, “I should say that from about 1860-65 or thereabouts he ruled England in the region of thought as very few men ever did: I do not expect to see anything like it again.” (Collini 1991, 178). Mill established this rule over English thought through his writings in logic, epistemology, economics, social and political philosophy, ethics, metaphysics, religion, and current affairs. One can say with relative security, looking at the breadth and complexity of his work, that Mill was the greatest nineteenth century British philosopher.

This rule did not come about accidentally. It had been planned by his father James Mill from the younger Mill’s birth on May 20, 1806. The elder Mill was a towering figure for his eldest child, and Mill’s story must be told through his father’s. James Mill was born in Scotland in 1773 to a family of modest means. Through the patronage of Sir John and Lady Jane Stuart, he was able to attend the University of Edinburgh, which at the time was one of the finest universities in Europe. He trained for the Presbyterian ministry under the auspices of admired teachers like Dugald Stewart, who was an effective popularizer of Thomas Reid’s philosophy.

After a brief and generally unsuccessful stint as a minister, James Mill moved to London, where he began his career in letters. This was a difficult path for a man of very modest resources to take; he and his wife Harriet (married 1805) lived without financial security for well over a decade. It was only with the publication of his The History of British India in 1818—a work that took twelve years to write—that Mill was able to land a stable, well paying job at the East India Company that enabled him to support his large family (ultimately consisting of his wife and nine children).

Throughout the years of relative poverty, James Mill received assistance from friends including the great legal theorist and utilitarian reformer Jeremy Bentham, whom he met in 1808. The two men helped lead the movement of “Philosophic Radicals” that gave intellectual heft to the British Radical party of the early to mid-nineteenth century. Among their colleagues were David Ricardo, George Grote, Sir William Molesworth, John Austin, and Francis Place.

This philosophically inspired radicalism of the early nineteenth century positioned itself against the Whigs and Tories. The Radicals advocated for legal and political reform, universal male suffrage, the use of economic theory (especially Ricardo’s) in political decision-making, and a politics oriented by human happiness rather than by conservatism or by natural rights (which Bentham famously derided as “nonsense upon stilts”). Moreover, one aspect of their political temperament that distinguished them from Whigs and Tories was their rationalism—their willingness to recommend re-structuring social and political institutions under the explicit guidance of principles of reason (e.g. the principle of utility).

With Bentham’s financial support, the Radicals founded the Westminster Review (1824) to counter the Whig Edinburgh Review (1802) and the Tory Quarterly Review (1809). While Whig intellectuals and Radicals tended to align with each other on economic issues, both tending towards pro-urban, pro-industrial, laissez-faire policies, Tory intellectuals focused on defending traditional British social structures and ways of life associated with aristocratic agrarianism. These alliances can be seen in disputes over the Tory-supported Corn Laws, legislation meant to protect domestic agriculture by taxing imported grains.

Though Whigs and Radicals were often allied (eventually forming the Liberal party in the 1840s), some of the most acrimonious political and intellectual rows of the period were over their differences (for example, Macaulay’s famous public disputes with James Mill over political theorizing). James Mill saw the Whigs as too imbued with aristocratic interests to be a true organ of democratic reform. Only the Radicals could properly advocate for the middle and working classes. Moreover, unlike the Radicals, who possessed a systematic politics guided by the principle of utility (the principle that set the promotion of aggregate happiness as the standard for legislation and action), the Whigs lacked a systematic politics. The Whigs depended instead on a loose empiricism, which the senior Mill took as an invitation to complacency. Whigs, alternatively, took exception to the rationalistic tenor of the Radicals’ politics, seeing in it a dangerous psychological and historical naiveté. They also reacted to the extremity of the Radicals’ reformist temperaments, which revealed hostility to the Anglican church and to religion more generally.

The younger Mill was seen as the crown prince of the Philosophic Radical movement and his famous education reflected the hopes of his father and Bentham. Under the dominating gaze of his father, he was taught Greek beginning at age three and Latin at eight. He read histories, many of the Greek and Roman classics, and Newton by eleven. He studied logic and math, moving to political economy and legal philosophy in his early teens, and then went on to metaphysics. His training facilitated active command of the material through the requirement that he teach his younger siblings and through evening walks with his father when the precocious pupil would have to tell his father what he had learned that day. His year in France in 1820 led to a fluency in French and initiated his life-long interest in French thought and politics. As he matured, his father and Bentham both employed him as an editor. In addition, he founded a number of intellectual societies and study groups and began to contribute to periodicals, including the Westminster Review.

The stress of his education and of his youthful activity combined with other factors to lead to what he later termed, in his Autobiography, his “mental crisis” of 1826. There have been a wide variety of attempts to explain what led to this crisis—most of which center around his relation to his demanding father—but what matters most about the crisis is that it represents the beginning of Mill’s struggle to revise his father’s and Bentham’s thought, which he grew to think of as limited in a number of ways. Mill claims that he began to come out of his depression with the help of poetry (specifically Wordsworth). This contributed to his sense that while his education had fostered his analytic abilities, it had left his capacity for feeling underdeveloped. This realization made him re-think the attachment to the radical, rationalistic strands of Enlightenment thought that his education was meant to promote.

In response to this crisis, Mill began exploring Romanticism and a variety of other European intellectual movements that rejected secular, naturalistic, worldly conceptions of human nature. He also became interested in criticisms of urbanization and industrialization. These explorations were furthered by the writings of (and frequent correspondence with) thinkers from a wide sampling of intellectual traditions, including Thomas Carlyle, Auguste Comte, Alexis de Tocqueville, John Ruskin, M. Gustave d’Eichtal (and other St. Simonians), Herbert Spencer, Frederick Maurice, and John Sterling.

The attempt to rectify the perceived deficiencies of the Philosophic Radicals through engagement with other styles of thought began with Mill’s editing of a new journal, the London Review, founded by the two Mills and Charles Molesworth. Molesworth quickly bought out the old Westminster Review in 1834, to leave the new London and Westminster Review as the unopposed voice of the radicals. With James Mill’s death in 1836 and Bentham’s 1832 demise, Mill had more intellectual freedom. He used that freedom to forge a new “philosophic radicalism” that incorporated the insights of thinkers like Coleridge and Thomas Carlyle. (Collected Works [CW], I.209). One of his principal goals was “to shew that there was a Radical philosophy, better and more complete than Bentham’s, while recognizing and incorporating all of Bentham’s which is permanently valuable.” (CW, I.221).

This project is perhaps best indicated by Mill’s well-known essays of 1838 and 1840 on Bentham and Coleridge, which were published in the London and Westminster Review. Mill suggested that Bentham and Coleridge were “the two great seminal minds of England in their age” and used each essay to show their strengths and weaknesses, implying that a more complete philosophical position remained open for articulation. Mill would spend his career attempting to carry that out.

Harriet Taylor, friend, advisor, and eventual wife, helped him with this project. He met Taylor in 1830 and she was to join James Mill as one of the two most important people in Mill’s life. Unfortunately for Mill, Taylor was married. After two decades of an intense and somewhat scandalous platonic relationship, they were married in 1851 after her husband’s death. Her death in 1858 left him inconsolable.

There has been substantial debate about the nature and extent of Harriet Taylor’s influence on Mill. Beyond question is that Mill found in her a partner, friend, critic, and someone who encouraged him. Mill was probably most swayed by her in the realms of political, ethical, and social thought, but less so in the areas of logic and political economy (with the possible exception of his views on socialism).

Mill’s day-to-day existence was dominated by his work at the East India Company, though his job required little time, paid him well, and left him ample opportunity for writing. He began there in 1826, working under his father, and by his retirement in 1857, he held the same position as his father, chief examiner, which put him in charge of the memoranda guiding the company’s policies in India.

On his retirement and after the death of his wife, Mill was recruited to stand for a Parliamentary seat. Though he was not particularly effective during his one term as an MP, he participated in three dramatic events. (Capaldi 2004, 326-7). First, Mill attempted to amend the 1867 Reform Bill to substitute “person” for “man” so that the franchise would be extended to women. Though the effort failed, it generated momentum for women’s suffrage. Second, he headed the Jamaica Committee, which pushed (unsuccessfully) for the prosecution of Governor Eyre of Jamaica, who had imposed brutal martial law after an uprising by blacks. Third, Mill used his influence with the leaders of the laboring classes to defuse a potentially dangerous confrontation between government troops and workers who were protesting the defeat of the 1866 Reform Bill.

After his term in Parliament ended and he was not re-elected, Mill began spending more time in France, writing, walking, and living with his wife’s daughter, Helen Taylor. It was to her that he uttered his last words in 1873, “You know that I have done my work.” He was buried next to his wife, Harriet.

Though Mill’s influence has waxed and waned since his death, his writings in ethics and social and political philosophy continue to be read most often. Many of his texts—particularly On Liberty, Utilitarianism, The Subjection of Women, and his Autobiography—continue to be reprinted and taught in universities throughout the world.

2. Works

Mill wrote on a startling number of topics. All his major texts, however, play a role in defending his new philosophic radicalism and the intellectual, moral, political, and social agendas associated with it.

a. A System of Logic

Though Mill’s biography reveals his openness to intellectual exploration, his most basic philosophical commitment—to naturalism—never seriously wavers. He is committed to the idea that our best methods of explaining the world are those employed by the natural sciences. Anything that we can know about human minds and wills comes from treating them as part of the causal order investigated by the sciences, rather than as special entities that lie outside it.

By taking the methods of the natural sciences as the only route to knowledge about the world, Mill sees himself as rejecting the “German, or a priori view of human knowledge,” (CW, I.233) or, as he also calls it, “intuitionism,” which was espoused in different ways by Kant, Reid, and their followers in Britain (e.g. Whewell and Hamilton). Though there are many differences among intuitionist thinkers, one “grand doctrine” that Mill suggests they all affirm is the view that “the constitution of the mind is the key to the constitution of external nature—that the laws of the human intellect have a necessary correspondence with the objective laws of the universe, such that these may be inferred from those.” (CW, XI.343). The intuitionist doctrine conceives of nature as being largely or wholly constituted by the mind rather than more or less imperfectly observed by it. One of the great dangers presented by this doctrine, from the perspective of Mill’s a posteriori school, is that it supports the belief that one can know universal truths about the world through evidence (including intuitions or Kantian categories of the understanding) provided by the mind alone rather than by nature. If the mind constitutes the world that we experience, then we can understand the world by understanding the mind. It was this freedom from appeal to nature and the lack of independent (i.e. empirical) checks to the knowledge claims associated with it that Mill found so disturbing.

For Mill, the problems with intuitionism extend far beyond the metaphysical and epistemological to the moral and political. As Mill says in his Autobiography when discussing his important treatise of 1843, A System of Logic:

The notion that truths external to the mind may be known by intuition or consciousness, independently of observation and experience, is, I am persuaded, in these times, the great intellectual support of false doctrines and bad institutions. By the aid of this theory, every inveterate belief and every intense feeling, of which the origin is not remembered, is enabled to dispense with the obligation of justifying itself by reason, and is erected into its own all-sufficient voucher and justification. There never was such an instrument devised for consecrating all deep-seated prejudices. And the chief strength of this false philosophy in morals, politics, and religion, lies in the appeal which it is accustomed to make to the evidence of mathematics and of the cognate branches of physical science. To expel it from these, is to drive it from its stronghold. (CW, I.233)

This charge against intuitionism, that it frees one from the obligation of justifying one’s beliefs, has strong roots in philosophic radicalism. We find Bentham, in his 1789 An Introduction to the Principles of Morals and Legislation, attacking non-utilitarian moral systems for just this reason: “They consist all of them in so many contrivances for avoiding the obligation of appealing to any external standard, and for prevailing upon the reader to accept of the author’s sentiment or opinion as a reason and that a sufficient one for itself.” (IPML, II.14). Mill thus saw his own commitment to the naturalism and empiricism of the “a posteriori school” of thought as part of a broader social and political agenda that advocated for reform and also undercut traditional foundations of conservatism.

Intuitionism, however, is often taken to be on much firmer ground than empiricism when it comes to accounting for our knowledge of mathematics and logic. This is especially true if one rejects the idea, found in people like Hobbes and Hume, that mathematical propositions like 2 + 3 = 5 are true merely because of the meaning of the constituents of the proposition, or, as Hume puts it, because of the proposition’s “relations of ideas.” Mill agrees with those (including Kant) who maintain that logical and mathematical truths are not merely linguistic—that they contain substantive, non-linguistic information. But this leaves Mill with the problem of accounting for the apparent necessity of such truths—a necessity which seems to rule out their origin in experience. To successfully attack intuitionism in “its stronghold,” the System of Logic needs to provide alternative grounds for basic principles of logic and mathematics (e.g. the principle of non-contradiction). In particular, Mill needs to show how “that peculiar character of what are called necessary truths” may be explained from experience and association alone.

The object of logic “is to ascertain how we come by that portion of our knowledge (much the greatest portion) which is not intuitive: and by what criterion we can, in matters not self-evident, distinguish between things proved and things not proved, between what is worthy and what is unworthy of belief.” (A System of Logic [System], I.i.1). It should be noted that logic goes beyond formal logic for Mill and into the conditions of truth more generally.

The text has the following basic structure. Book I addresses names and propositions. Books II and III examine deduction and induction, respectively. Book IV discusses a variety of operations of the mind, including observation, abstraction and naming, which are presupposed in all induction or instrumental to more complicated forms of induction. Book V reveals fallacies of reasoning. Finally, in Book VI, Mill treats the “moral sciences” and argues for the fundamental similarity of the methods of the natural and human sciences. In fact, the human sciences can be understood as themselves natural sciences with human objects of study.

i. Names, Propositions, and the Principles of Logic and Mathematics

Mill’s argument that the principles of mathematics and logic are justified by appeal to experience depends upon his distinction between verbal and real propositions, that is, between propositions that do not convey new information to the person who understands the meaning of the proposition’s terms and those propositions that do convey new information. The point of the distinction between verbal and real propositions is, first, to stress that all real propositions are a posteriori. Second, the distinction emphasizes that verbal propositions are empty of content; they tell us about language (i.e. what words mean) rather than about the world. In Kantian terms, Mill wants to deny the possibility of synthetic a priori propositions, while contending that we can still make sense of our knowledge of subjects like logic and mathematics.

This distinction between verbal and real propositions depends, in turn, upon Mill’s analysis of the meaning of propositions, i.e. how the meanings of constituents of propositions determine the meaning of the whole. A proposition, in which something is affirmed or denied of something, is formed by putting together two “names” or terms (subject and predicate) and a copula. The subject is the name “denoting the person or thing which something is affirmed or denied of.” (System, I.i.2). The predicate is “the name denoting that which is affirmed or denied.” The copula is “the sign denoting that there is an affirmation or denial,” which thereby enables “the hearer or reader to distinguish a proposition from any other kind of discourse.” In the proposition ‘gold is yellow’ for example, the copula ‘is’ shows that the quality yellow is being affirmed of the substance gold.

Mill divides names into general and singular names. All names, except proper names (e.g. Ringo, Buckley, etc) and names that signify an attribute only (e.g. whiteness, length), have a connotation and a denotation. That is, they both connote or imply some attribute(s) and denote or pick out individuals that fall under that description. The general name “man,” for example, denotes Socrates, Picasso, Plutarch and an indefinite number of other individuals, and it does so because they all share some attribute(s) (e.g. rational animal, featherless biped, etc.) connoted by man. The name “white” denotes all white things and implies or connotes the attribute whiteness. The word “whiteness,” by contrast, denotes or signifies an attribute but does not connote an attribute. Instead, it operates like a proper name in that its meaning derives entirely from what it denotes.

The meaning of a typical proposition is that the thing(s) denoted by the subject has the attribute(s) connoted by the predicate. In sentences like “Eleanor is tired” and “All men are mortal,” though the subjects pick out their objects differently (through a proper name and through an attribute, respectively), Mill’s basic story about the meaning of propositions holds.

Things become much more difficult with identity statements like “Hesperus is Phosphorus.” In this case, we have two proper names that pick out the same object (the planet Venus). Under Mill’s view, these proper names should have the same meaning because they denote the same object. But this appears untenable because the statement seems informative. It doesn’t seem plausible that the proposition merely states that an object is identical with itself, which would be the proposition’s meaning if Mill’s views on the meaning of proper names were correct. (See Frege and Russell’s attack on Mill’s account of the meaning of proper names; but see Kripke’s sophisticate defense of Mill on this in Naming and Necessity).

This discussion of the nature of names or terms enables us to understand Mill’s treatment of verbal and real propositions. Verbal propositions assert something about the meaning of names rather than about matters of fact. This means that, “(s)ince names and their signification are entirely arbitrary, such propositions are not, strictly speaking, susceptible of truth or falsity, but only of conformity or disconformity to usage or convention.” (System, This kind of proposition simply “asserts of a thing under a particular name, only what is asserted of it in the fact of calling it by that name; and which, therefore, either gives no information, or gives it respecting the name, not the thing.” ( As such, verbal propositions are empty of content and they are the only things we know a priori, independently of checking the correspondence of the proposition to the world.

Real propositions, in contrast, “predicate of a thing some fact not involved in the signification of the name by which the proposition speaks of it; some attribute not connoted by that name.” ( Such propositions convey information that is not already included in the names or terms employed, and their truth or falsity depends on whether or not they correspond to relevant features of the world. Thus, “George is on the soccer team” predicates something of the subject George that is not included in its meaning (in this case, the denotation of the individual person) and its being true or not depends upon whether George is, in fact, on the team.

Mill’s great contention in the System of Logic is that logic and mathematics contain real, rather than merely verbal, propositions. He claims, for example, that the law of contradiction (i.e. the same proposition cannot at the same time be false and true) and the law of excluded middle (i.e. either a proposition is true or it is false) are both real propositions. They are, like the axioms of geometry, experimental truths, not truths known a priori. They represent generalizations or inductions from observation—very well-justified inductions, to be sure, but inductions nonetheless. This leads Mill to say that the necessity typically ascribed to the truths of mathematics and logic by his intuitionist opponents is an illusion, thereby undermining intuitionist argumentative fortifications at their strongest point.

A System of Logic thus represents the most thorough attempt to argue for empiricism in epistemology, logic, and mathematics before the twentieth century (for the best discussion of this point, see Skorupski 1989). Though revolutionary advances in logic and philosophy of language in the late nineteenth and early twentieth centuries have rendered many of Mill’s technical points about semantics and logic obsolete, the basic philosophical vision that Mill defends is very much a live option (see, for example, the work of Quine).

ii. Other Topics of Interest

There are some other topics covered in the System of Logic that are of interest. First is Mill’s treatment of deduction (in the form of the syllogism). His discussion is driven by one basic concern: Why wouldn’t a deduction simply tell us what we already know? How can it be informative? Mill discounts two common views about the syllogism, namely, that it is useless (because it tells us what we already know) and that it is the correct analysis of what the mind actually does when it discovers truths. To understand why Mill discounts these ways of thinking about deduction, we need to understand his views on inference.

The key point here is that all inference is from particular to particular. When we infer that the Duke of Wellington is mortal from “All men are mortal,” what we are really doing is inferring the Duke’s mortality from the mortality of the individual people with whose mortality we are familiar. What the mind does in making a deductive inference is not to move from a universal truth to a particular one. Rather, it moves from truths about a number of particulars to a smaller number (or one). The general statement that “All men are mortal” only allows us to more easily register what we know—it reflects neither the true inference being made nor the warrant or evidence we have for making the inference. Though general propositions are not necessary for reasoning, they are heuristically useful (as are the syllogisms that employ them). They aid us in memory and comprehension.

Mill’s famous treatment of induction reveals the a posteriori grounds for belief. He focuses on four different methods of experimental inquiry that attempt to single out from the circumstances that precede or follow a phenomenon the ones that are linked to the phenomenon by an invariable law. (System, III.viii.1). That is, we test to see if a purported causal connection exists by observing the relevant phenomena under an assortment of situations. If we wish, for example, to know whether a virus causes a disease, how can we prove it? What counts as good evidence for such a belief? The four methods of induction or experimental inquiry—the methods of agreement, of difference, of residues, and of concomitant variation—provide answers to these questions by showing what we need to demonstrate in order to claim that a causal law holds. Can we show, using the method of difference, that when the virus is not present the disease is also absent? If so, then we have some grounds for believing that the virus causes the disease.

Another issue addressed in A System of Logic that is of abiding interest is Mill’s handling of free will. Mill’s commitment to naturalism includes treating the human will as a potential object of scientific study: “Our will causes our bodily actions in the same sense, and in no other, in which cold causes ice, or a spark causes an explosion of gunpowder. The volition, a state of our mind, is the antecedent; the motion of our limbs in conformity to the volition, is the consequent.” (System, III.v.11). The questions that readily arise are how, under this view, can one take the will to be free and how can we preserve responsibility and feelings of choice?

In his Autobiography, Mill recounts his own youthful, melancholy acceptance of the doctrine of “Philosophical Necessity” (advocated by, among others, Robert Owen and his followers): “I felt as if I was scientifically proved to be the helpless slave of antecedent circumstances; as if my character and that of all others had been formed for us by agencies beyond our control, and was wholly out of our own power.” (CW, I.175-7). But it is precisely the idea that our character is formed for us, not by us, that Mill thinks is a “grand error.” (System, VI.ii.3). We have the power to alter our own character. Though our own character is formed by circumstances, among those circumstances are our own desires. We cannot directly will our characters to be one way rather than another, but we can will actions that shape those characters.

Mill addresses an obvious objection: what leads us to will to change our character? Isn’t that determined? Mill agrees. Our desire to change our character is determined largely by our experience of painful and pleasant consequences associated with our character. For Mill, however, the important point is that, even if we don’t control the desire to change our character, we are still left with the feeling of moral freedom, which is the feeling of being able to modify our own character “if we wish.” (System, VI.ii.3). What Mill wants to save in the doctrine of free will is simply the feeling that we have “real power over the formation of our own character.” (CW, I.177). If we have the desire to change our character, we find that we can. If we lack that desire it is “of no consequence what we think forms our character,” because we don’t care about altering it. For Mill, this is a thick enough notion of freedom to avoid fatalism.

One of the basic problems for this kind of naturalistic picture of human beings and wills is that it clashes with our first-person image of ourselves as reasoners and agents. As Kant understood, and as the later hermeneutic tradition emphasizes, we think of ourselves as autonomous followers of objectively given rules (Skorupski 1989, 279). It seems extremely difficult to provide a convincing naturalistic account of, for example, making a choice (without explaining away as illusory our first-person experience of making choices).

The desire to treat the will as an object, like ice or gunpowder, open to natural scientific study falls within Mill’s broader claim that the moral sciences, which include economics, history, and psychology among others, are fundamentally similar to the natural sciences. Though we may have difficulty running experiments in the human realm, that realm and its objects are, in principle, just as open to the causal explanations we find in physics or biology.

Perhaps the most interesting element of his analysis of the moral sciences is his commitment to what has been called “methodological individualism,” or the view that social and political phenomena are explicable by appeal to the behavior of individuals. In other words, social facts are reducible to facts about individuals: “The laws of the phenomena of society are, and can be, nothing but the laws of the actions and passions of human beings united together in the social state. Men, however, in a state of society, are still men; their actions and passions are obedient to the laws of individual human nature. Men are not, when brought together, converted into another kind of substance with different properties.” (System, VI.vii.1).

This position puts Mill in opposition to Auguste Comte, a founding figure in social theory (he coined the term “sociology”) and an important influence on, and correspondent with, Mill. Comte takes sociology rather than psychology to be the most basic of human sciences and takes individuals and their conduct to be best understood through the lens of social analysis. To put it simplistically, for Comte, the individual is an abstraction from the whole—its beliefs and conduct are determined by history and society. We understand the individual best, on this view, when we see the individual as an expression of its social institutions and setting. This naturally leads to a kind of historicism. Though Mill recognized the important influences of social institutions and history on individuals, for him society is nevertheless only able to shape individuals through affecting their experiences—experiences structured by universal principles of human psychology that operate in all times and places. (See Mandelbaum 1971, 167ff).

b. An Examination of Sir William Hamilton’s Philosophy

Mill’s attacks on intuitionism continued throughout his life. One notable example is his 1865 An Examination of Sir William Hamilton’s Philosophy, which revisits much of the same ground as A System of Logic in the guise of a thorough-going criticism of Hamilton, a thinker influenced by Reid and Kant whom Mill took as representing “the great fortress of the intuitional philosophy in this country.” (CW, I.270). The rather hefty volume explores “some of the disputed questions in the domain of psychology and metaphysics.” (CW, I.271).

Among the doctrines given most attention is that of the “relativity of knowledge,” something to which Mill takes Hamilton as insufficiently committed. It is the idea that we have no access to “things-in-themselves” (thus, the relativity versus absoluteness of knowledge) and that we are limited to analyzing the phenomena of consciousness. Mill, who accepts this basic principle, counts himself as a Berkeleian phenomenalist and famously defines matter in the Examination as “a Permanent Possibility of Sensation,” (CW, IX.183), thinks that Hamilton accepts this doctrine in a confused manner. “He affirms without reservation, that certain attributes (extension, figures, etc.) are known to us as they really exist out of ourselves; and also that all our knowledge of them is relative to us. And these two assertions are only reconcileable, if relativity to us is understood in the altogether trivial sense, that we know them only so far as our faculties permit.” (CW, IX.22). Hamilton therefore seems to want to have his cake and eat it too when it comes to knowledge of the external world. On the one hand, he wants to declare that we have access to things as they are, thereby aligning himself with Reid’s project of avoiding the fall into (Humean) skepticism—a fall prompted by the Lockean “way of ideas.” On the other hand, he wants to follow Kant in limiting our knowledge of things-in-themselves, thereby reigning in the pretensions of metaphysical speculation. Mill avoids this dilemma by rejecting Hamilton’s position that we know things outside as they really are.

One point of historical interest about the Examination is the impact that it had on the way that the history of philosophy is taught. Mill’s demolition of Hamilton’s reputation led to the removal of Reid and the school of Scottish “common sense” philosophy from the curriculum in Britain and America. As Kuklick puts it, the success of Mill’s Examination “is the crucial event in understanding the development of the contemporary view of Modern Philosophy in America.” By destroying “the credibility of the entire Scottish reply to Hume,” Mill’s Examination led Anglo-American philosophers to turn to Kant in the later part of the nineteenth century in order to find more satisfactory response to Humean skepticism (Kuklick 1984, 128). Thus, the standard course in Modern Philosophy that includes all or some of Descartes, Spinoza, Leibniz, Locke, Berkeley, Hume, and Kant, is partly an unintended consequence of the publication of Mill’s attack on Hamilton and on intuitionism more broadly.

c. Psychological Writings

As noted in the discussion of A System of Logic, Mill’s commitment to “methodological individualism” makes psychology the foundational moral science. Though he never wrote a work of his own on psychology, he edited and contributed notes to an 1869 re-issue of his father’s 1829 work in psychology, Analysis of the Phenomena of the Human Mind, and reviewed the work of his friend and correspondent, Alexander Bain. All three were proponents of the associationist school of psychology, whose roots go back to Hobbes and especially Locke and whose members included Gay, Hartley, and Priestly in the eighteenth century and the Mills, Bain, and Herbert Spencer in the nineteenth century.

Mill distinguishes between the a posteriori and a priori schools of psychology. The former “resolves the whole contents of the mind into experience.” (CW, XI.341). The latter emphasizes that “in every act of thought, down to the most elementary, there is an ingredient which is not given to the mind, but contributed by the mind in virtue of its inherent powers.” (CW, XI.344). In the a priori or intuitionist school, experience “instead of being the source and prototype of our ideas, is itself a product of the mind’s own forces working on the impressions we receive from without, and has always a mental as well as an external element.” (CW, XI.344).

The associationist version of a posteriori psychology has two basic doctrines: “first, that the more recondite phenomena of the mind are formed out of the more simple and elementary; and, secondly, that the mental law, by means of which this formation takes place, is the Law of Association.” (CW, XI.345). The associationist psychologists, then, would attempt to explain mental phenomena by showing them to be the ultimate product of simpler components of experience (e.g. color, sound, smell, pleasure, pain) connected to each other through associations. These associations take two basic forms: resemblance and contiguity in space and/or time. Thus, these psychologists attempt to explain our idea of an orange or our feelings of greed as the product of simpler ideas connected by association.

Part of the impulse for this account of psychology is its apparent scientific character and beauty. Associationism attempts to explain a large variety of mental phenomena on the basis of experience plus very few mental laws of association. It therefore appeals to those who are particularly drawn to simplicity in their scientific theories.

Another attraction of associationist psychology, however, is its implications for views on moral education and social reform. If the contents of our minds, including beliefs and moral feelings, are products of experiences that we undergo connected according to very simple laws, then this raises the possibility that human beings are capable of being radically re-shaped—that our natures, rather than being fixed, are open to major alteration. In other words, if our minds are cobbled together by laws of association working on the materials of experience, then this suggests that if our experiences were to change, so would our minds. This doctrine tends to place much greater emphasis on social and political institutions like the family, the workplace, and the state, than does the doctrine that the nature of the mind offers strong resistance to being shaped by experience (i.e. that the mind molds experience rather than being molded by it). Associationism thereby fits nicely into an agenda of reform, because it suggests that many of the problems of individuals are explained by their situations (and the associations that these situations promote) rather than by some intrinsic feature of the mind. As Mill puts it in the Autobiography in discussing the conflict between the intuitionist and a posteriori schools:

The practical reformer has continually to demand that changes be made in things which are supported by powerful and widely spread feelings, or to question the apparent necessity and indefeasibleness of established facts; and it is often an indispensable part of his argument to shew, how these powerful feelings had their origin, and how those facts came to seem necessary and indefeasible. There is therefore a natural hostility between him and a philosophy which discourages the explanation of feelings and moral facts by circumstances and association, and prefers to treat them as ultimate elements of human nature…I have long felt that the prevailing tendency to regard all the marked distinctions of human character as innate, and in the main indelible, and to ignore the irresistible proofs that by far the greater part of those differences, whether between individuals, races, or sexes, are such as not only might but naturally would be produced by differences in circumstances, is one of the chief hindrances to the rational treatment of great social questions, and one of the greatest stumbling blocks to human improvement. (CW, I.269-70).

d. Utilitarianism

Another maneuver in his battle with intuitionism came when Mill published Utilitarianism (1861) in installments in Fraser’s Magazine (it was later brought out in book form in 1863). It offers a candidate for a first principle of morality, a principle that provides us with a criterion distinguishing right and wrong. The utilitarian candidate is the principle of utility, which holds that “actions are right in proportion as they tend to promote happiness; wrong as they tend to produce the reverse of happiness. By happiness is intended pleasure and the absence of pain; by unhappiness, pain and the privation of pleasure.” (CW, X.210).

i. History of the Principle of Utility

By Mill’s time, the principle of utility possessed a long history stretching back to the 1730’s (with roots going further back to Hobbes, Locke, and even to Epicurus). In the eighteenth and early nineteenth centuries, it had been explicitly invoked by three British intellectual factions. Though all may have agreed that an action’s consequences for the general happiness were to dictate its rightness or wrongness, the reasons behind the acceptance of that principle and the uses to which the principle was put varied greatly.

The earliest supporters of the principle of utility were the religious utilitarians represented by, among others, John Gay, John Brown, Soame Jenyns, and, most famously, William Paley, whose 1785 The Principles of Moral and Political Philosophy was one of the most frequently re-printed and well read books of moral thought of the late eighteenth and early nineteenth centuries (to Mill’s dismay, Bentham’s utilitarianism was often conflated with Paley’s). Religious utilitarianism was very popular among the educated classes and dominated in the universities until the 1830’s. These thinkers were all deeply influenced by Locke’s empiricism and psychological hedonism and often stood opposed to the competing moral doctrines of Shaftesbury, Hutcheson, Clarke, and Wollaston.

The religious utilitarians looked to the Christian God to address a basic problem, namely how to harmonize the interests of individuals, who are motivated by their own happiness, with the interests of the society as a whole. Once we understand that what we must do is what God wills (because of God’s power of eternal sanction) and that God wills the happiness of his creatures, morality and our own self-interest will be seen to overlap. God guarantees that an individual’s self-interest lies in virtue, in furthering the happiness of others. Without God and his sanctions of eternal punishment and reward, it would be hard to find motives that “are likely to be found sufficient to withhold men from the gratification of lust, revenge, envy, ambition, avarice.” (Paley 2002 [1785], 39). As we shall see in a moment, another possible motivation for caring about the general happiness—this one non-religious—is canvassed by Mill in Chapter Three of Utilitarianism.

In contrast to religious utilitarianism, which had few aspirations to be a moral theory that revises ordinary moral attitudes, the two late-eighteenth century secular versions of utilitarianism grew out of various movements for reform. The principle of utility—and the correlated commitments to happiness as the only intrinsically desirable end and to the moral equivalency of the happiness of different individuals—was itself taken to be an instrument of reform.

One version of secular utilitarianism was represented by William Godwin (husband of Mary Wollstonecraft and father of Mary Shelley), who achieved great notoriety with the publication of his Political Justice of 1793. Though his fame (or infamy) was relatively short-lived, Godwin’s use of the principle of utility for the cause of radical political and social critique began the identification of utilitarianism with anti-religiosity and with dangerous democratic values.

The second version of secular utilitarianism, and the one that inspired Mill, arose from the work of Jeremy Bentham. Bentham, who was much more successful than Godwin at building a movement around his ideas, employed the principle of utility as a device of political, social, and legal criticism. It is important to note, however, that Bentham’s interest in the principle of utility did not arise from concern about ethical theory as much as from concern about legislative and legal reform.

This history enables us to understand Mill’s invocation of the principle of utility in its polemical context—Mill’s support of that principle should not be taken as mere intellectual exercise. In the realm of politics, the principle of utility served to bludgeon opponents of reform. First and foremost, reform meant extension of the vote. But it also meant legal reform, including overhaul of the common law system and of legal institutions, and varieties of social reform, especially of institutions that tended to favor aristocratic and moneyed interests. Though Bentham and Godwin intended it to have this function in the late eighteenth century, utilitarianism became influential only when tied with the political machinery of the Radical party, which had particular prominence on the English scene in the 1830’s.

In the realm of ethical debate, Mill took his opponents to be the “intuitionists” led by Sedgwick and Whewell, both Cambridge men. They were the contemporary representatives of an ethical tradition that understood its history as tied to Butler, Reid, Coleridge, and turn of the century German thought (especially that of Kant). Though intuitionists and members of Mill’s a posteriori or “inductive” school recognize “to a great extent, the same moral laws,” they differ “as to their evidence and the source from which they derive their authority. According to the one opinion, the principles of morals are evident a priori, requiring nothing to command assent except that the meaning of the terms be understood. According to the other doctrine, right and wrong, as well as truth and falsehood, are questions of observation and experience.” (CW, X.206).

The chief danger represented by the proponents of intuitionism was not from the ethical content of their theories per se, which defended honesty, justice, benevolence, etc., but from the kinds of justifications offered for their precepts and the support such a view lent to the social and political status quo. As we saw in the discussion of the System of Logic and with reference to Mill’s statements in his Autobiography, he takes intuitionism to be dangerous because it allegedly enables people to ratify their own prejudices as moral principles—in intuitionism, there is no “external standard” by which to adjudicate differing moral claims (for example, Mill understood Kant’s categorical imperative as getting any moral force it possesses either from considerations of utility or from mere prejudice hidden by hand-waving). The principle of utility, alternatively, evaluates moral claims by appealing to the external standard of pain and pleasure. It presented each individual for moral consideration as someone capable of suffering and enjoyment.

ii. Basic Argument

Mill’s defense of the principle of utility in Utilitarianism includes five chapters. In the first, Mill sets out the problem, distinguishes between the intuitionist and “inductive” schools of morality, and also suggests limits to what we can expect from proofs of first principles of morality. He argues that “(q)uestions of ultimate ends are not amenable to direct proof.” (CW, X.207). All that can be done is to present considerations “capable of determining the intellect either to give or withhold its assent to the doctrine; and this is equivalent to proof.” (CW, X.208). Ultimately, he will want to prove in Chapter Four the basis for the principle of utility—that happiness is the only intrinsically desirable thing—by showing that we spontaneously accept it on reflection. (Skorupski 1989, 8). It is rather easy to show that happiness is something we desire intrinsically, not for the sake of other things. What is hard is to show that it is the only thing we intrinsically desire or value. Mill agrees that we do not always value things like virtue as means or instruments to happiness. We do sometimes seem to value such things for their own sakes. Mill contends, however, that on reflection we will see that when we appear to value them for their own sakes we are actually valuing them as parts of happiness (rather than as intrinsically desirable on their own or as means to happiness). That is, we value virtue, freedom, etc. as things that make us happy by their mere possession. This is all the proof we can give that happiness is our only ultimate end; it must rely on introspection and on careful and honest examination of our feelings and motives.

In Chapter Two, Mill corrects misconceptions about the principle of utility. One misconception is that utilitarianism, by endorsing the Epicurean view “that life has…no higher end than pleasure” is a “doctrine worthy only of swine.” (CW, X.210). Mill counters that “the accusation supposes human beings to be capable of no pleasures except those of which swine are capable.” (CW, X.210). He proffers a distinction (one not found in Bentham) between higher and lower pleasures, with higher pleasures including mental, aesthetic, and moral pleasures. When we are evaluating whether or not an action is good by evaluating the happiness that we can expect to be produced by it, he argues that higher pleasures should be taken to be in kind (rather than by degree) preferable to lower pleasures. This has led scholars to wonder whether Mill’s utilitarianism differs significantly from Bentham’s and whether Mill’s distinction between higher and lower pleasures creates problems for our ability to know what will maximize aggregate happiness.

A second objection to the principle of utility is that “it is exacting too much to require that people shall always act from the inducement of promoting the general interest of society.” (CW, X.219). Mill replies that this is to “confound the rule of action with the motive of it.” (CW, X.219). Ethics is supposed to tell us what our duties are, “but no system of ethics requires that the sole motive of all we do shall be a feeling of duty; on the contrary, ninety-nine hundredths of all our actions are done from other motives, and rightly so done if the rule of duty does not condemn them.” (CW, X.219). To do the right thing, in other words, we do not need to be constantly motivated by concern for the general happiness. The large majority of actions intend the good of individuals (including ourselves) rather than the good of the world. Yet the world’s good is made up of the good of the individuals that constitute it and unless we are in the position of, say, a legislator, we act properly by looking to private rather than to public good. Our attention to the public well-being usually needs to extend only so far as is required to know that we aren’t violating the rights of others.

Chapter Three addresses the topic of motivation again by focusing on the following question: What is the source of our obligation to the principle of utility? What, in other words, motivates us to act in ways approved of by the principle of utility? With any moral theory, one must remember that ‘ought implies can,’ i.e. that if moral demands are to be legitimate, we must be the kind of beings that can meet those demands. Mill defends the possibility of a strong utilitarian conscience (i.e. a strong feeling of obligation to the general happiness) by showing how such a feeling can develop out of the natural desire we have to be in unity with fellow creatures—a desire that enables us to care what happens to them and to perceive our own interests as linked with theirs. Though Chapter Two showed that we do not need to attend constantly to the general happiness, it is nevertheless a sign of moral progress when the happiness of others, including the happiness of those we don’t know, becomes important to us.

Finally, Chapter Five shows how utilitarianism accounts for justice. In particular, Mill shows how utilitarianism can explain the special status we seem to grant to justice and to the violations of it. Justice is something we are especially keen to defend. Mill begins by marking off morality (the realm of duties) from expediency and worthiness by arguing that duties are those things we think people ought to be punished for not fulfilling. He then suggests that justice is demarcated from other areas of morality, because it includes those duties to which others have correlative rights, “Justice implies something which it is not only right to do, and wrong not to do, but which some individual person can claim from us as his moral right.” (CW, X.247). Though no one has a right to my charity, even if I have a duty to be charitable, others have rights not to have me injure them or to have me repay what I have promised.

Critics of utilitarianism have placed special emphasis on its inability to provide a satisfactory account of rights. For Mill, to have a right is “to have something which society ought to defend me in the possession of. If the objector goes on to ask why it ought, I can give no other reason than general utility.” (CW, X.250). But what if the general utility demands that we violate your rights? The intuition that something is wrong if your rights can be violated for the sake of the general good provoked the great challenge to utilitarian conceptions of justice, leveled with special force by twentieth century thinkers like John Rawls.

e. On Liberty

The topic of justice received further treatment at Mill’s hands in his famous 1859 book On Liberty. This work is the one, along with A System of Logic, that Mill thought would have the most longevity. It concerns civil and social liberty or, to look at it from the contrary point of view, the nature and limits of the power that can legitimately be exercised by society over the individual.

Mill begins by retelling the history of struggle between rulers and ruled and suggests that social rather than political tyranny is the greater danger for modern, commercial nations like Britain. This social “tyranny of the majority” (a phrase Mill takes from Tocqueville) arises from the enforcement of rules of conduct that are both arbitrary and strongly adhered to. The practical principle that guides the majority “to their opinions on the regulation of human conduct, is the feeling in each person’s mind that everybody should be required to act as he, and those with whom he sympathizes, would like them to act.” (On Liberty [OL], 48). Such a feeling is particularly dangerous because it is taken to be self-justifying and self-evident.

There is a need, therefore, for a rationally grounded principle which governs a society’s dealings with individuals. This “one very simple principle”—often called the “harm principle”—entails that:

[T]he sole end for which mankind are warranted, individually or collectively, in interfering with the liberty of action of any of their number, is self-protection. That the only purpose for which power can be rightfully exercised over any member of a civilized community, against his will, is to prevent harm to others. His own good, either physical or moral, is not a sufficient warrant. He cannot rightfully be compelled to do or forbear because it will be better for him to do so, because it will make him happier, because, in the opinion of others, to do so would be wise, or even right. These are good reasons for remonstrating with him, or reasoning with him, or persuading him, or entreating him, but not for compelling him, or visiting him with any evil in case he do otherwise. (OL, 51-2)

This anti-paternalistic principle identifies three basic regions of human liberty: the “inward domain of consciousness,” liberty of tastes and pursuits (i.e. of framing our own life plan), and the freedom to unite with others.

Mill, unlike other liberal theorists, makes no appeal to “abstract right” in order to justify the harm principle. The reason for accepting the freedom of individuals to act as they choose, so long as they cause minimal or no harm to others, is that it would promote “utility in the largest sense, grounded on the permanent interests of man as a progressive being.” (OL, 53). In other words, abiding by the harm principle is desirable because it promotes what Mill calls the “free development of individuality” or the development of our humanity.

Behind this rests the idea that humanity is capable of progress—that latent or underdeveloped abilities and virtues can be actualized under the right conditions. Human nature is not static. It is not merely re-expressed in generations and individuals. It is “not a machine to be built after a model, and set to do exactly the work prescribed for it, but a tree, which requires to grow and develop itself on all sides, according to the tendency of the inward forces which make it a living thing.” (OL, 105). Though human nature can be thought of as something living, it is also, like an English garden, something amenable to improvement through effort. “Among the works of man, which human life is rightly employed in perfecting and beautifying, the first in importance surely is man himself.” (OL, 105). The two conditions that promote development of our humanity are freedom and variety of situation, both of which the harm principle encourages.

A basic philosophical problem presented by the work is what counts as “harm to others.” Where should we mark the boundary between conduct that is principally self-regarding versus conduct that involves others? Does drug-use cause harm to others sufficient to be prevented? Does prostitution? Pornography? Should polygamy be allowed? How about public nudity? Though these are difficult questions, Mill provides the reader with a principled way of deliberating about them.

f. The Subjection of Women and Other Social and Political Writings

Many volumes of Mill’s writings deal with topics of social and political concern. These include writings on specific political problems in India, America, Ireland, France, and England, on the nature of democracy (Considerations on Representative Government) and civilization, on slavery, on law and jurisprudence, on the workplace, and on the family and the status of women. The last subject was the topic of Mill’s well-known The Subjection of Women, an important work in the history of feminism.

The radical nature of Mill’s call for women’s equality is often lost to us after over a century of protest and changing social attitudes. Yet the subordination of women to men when Mill was writing remains striking. Among other indicators of this subordination are the following: (1) British women had fewer grounds for divorce than men until 1923; (2) Husbands controlled their wives personal property (with the occasional exception of land) until the Married Women’s Property Acts of 1870 and 1882; (3) Children were the husband’s; (4) Rape was impossible within a marriage; and (5) Wives lacked crucial features of legal personhood, since the husband was taken as the representative of the family (thereby eliminating the need for women’s suffrage). This gives some indication of how disturbing and/or ridiculous the idea of a marriage between equals could appear to Victorians.

The object of the essay was to show “(t)hat the principle which regulates the existing social relations between the two sexes—the legal subordination of one sex to the other—is wrong in itself, and now one of the chief hindrances to human improvement; and that it ought to be replaced by a principle of perfect equality, admitting no power or privilege on the one side, nor disability on the other.” (CW, XXI.261). This shows how Mill appeals to both the patent injustice of contemporary familial arrangements and to the negative moral impact of those arrangements on the people within them. In particular, he discusses the ways in which the subordination of women negatively affects not only the women, but also the men and children in the family. This subordination stunts the moral and intellectual development of women by restricting their field of activities, pushing them either into self-sacrifice or into selfishness and pettiness. Men, alternatively, either become brutal through their relationships with women or turn away from projects of self-improvement to pursue the social “consideration” that women desire.

It is important to note that Mill’s concern for the status of women dovetails with the rest of his thought—it is not a disconnected issue. For example, his support for women’s equality was buttressed by associationism, which claims that minds are created by associative laws operating on experience. This implies that if we change the experiences and upbringing of women, then their minds will change. This enabled Mill to argue against those who tried to suggest that the subordination of women to men reflected a natural order that women were by nature incapable of equality with men. If many women were incapable of true friendship with noble men, says Mill, that is not a result of their natures, but of their faulty environments.

g. Principles of Political Economy

Another work that addresses issues of social and political concern is Mill’s Principles of Political Economy of 1848. The book went through numerous editions and served as the dominant British textbook in economics until being displaced by Alfred Marshall’s 1890 Principles of Economics. Mill intended the work as both a survey of contemporary economic thought (highlighting the theories of David Ricardo, but also including some contributions of his own on topics like international trade) and as an exploration of applications of economic ideas to social concerns. It was “not a book merely of abstract science, but also of application, and treated Political Economy not as a thing by itself, but as a fragment of a greater whole.” (CW, I.243). These two interests nicely divide the text into the first three more technical books on production, distribution, and exchange and the last two books, which address the influences of societal progress and of government on economic activity (and vice versa). The technical work is largely obsolete. Mill’s relating of economics and society, however, remains of great interest.

In particular, Mill shared concerns with others (e.g. Carlyle, Coleridge, Southey, etc.) about the moral impact of industrialization. Though many welcomed the material wealth produced by industrialization, there was a sense that those very cornerstones of British economic growth—the division of labor (including the increasing simplicity and repetitiveness of the work) and the growing size of factories and businesses—led to a spiritual and moral deadening.

Coleridge expressed this in his contrast of mere “civilization” with “cultivation”:

The permanency of the nation…and its progressiveness and personal freedom…depend on a continuing and progressive civilization. But civilization is itself but a mixed good, if not far more a corrupting influence, the hectic of disease, not the bloom of health, and a nation so distinguished more fitly to be called a varnished than a polished people, where this civilization is not grounded in cultivation, in the harmonious development of those qualities and faculties that characterize our humanity. We must be men in order to be citizens. (Coleridge 1839, 46).

“Civilization” expresses central features of modernization, including industrialism, cosmopolitanism, and increasing material wealth. But, for Coleridge, civilization needed to be subordinated to cultivation of our humanity (expressed in terms similar to those later found in On Liberty).

This concern for the moral impact of economic growth explains, among other things, his commitment to a brand of socialism. In an essay on the French historian Michelet, Mill praises the monastic associations of Italy and France after the reforms of St. Benedict: “Unlike the useless communities of contemplative ascetics in the East, they were diligent in tilling the earth and fabricating useful products; they knew and taught that temporal work may also be a spiritual exercise.” (CW, XX.240). It was the desire to transform temporal work into a spiritual and moral exercise that led Mill to favor socialist changes in the workplace.

In order to transform the workplace from a setting filled with antagonism into a “school of sympathy” that would enable workers to feel a part of something greater than themselves—thereby mitigating the rampant selfishness encouraged by industrial society—Mill recommends “industrial co-operatives.” Mill thought that these co-operatives had the advantage over communes or other socialist institutions because they were able to compete against traditional firms (his complaint against many other socialists is that they undervalued competition as a morally useful stimulus to activity). These co-operatives can take two forms: a profit-sharing system in which worker pay is tied to the success of the business or a worker co-operative in which workers share ownership of capital. The latter was preferable because it turned all the workers into entrepreneurs, calling upon many of the faculties that mere labor for pay left to atrophy.

Though Mill contended that laborers were generally unfit for socialism given their current level of education and development, he thought that modern industrial societies should take small steps towards fostering co-operatives. Included among these steps was the institution of limited partnerships. Up to Mill’s time, partners shared full liability for losses, including any personal property they owned—obviously a strong deterrent to the founding of worker co-operatives.

Mill’s recommendations for the economic organization of society, like his political and social policies, always paid careful attention to how institutions, laws, and practices impacted the intellectual, moral, and affective well-being of the individuals operating under or within them.

h. Essays on Religion

Mill’s criticism of traditional religious doctrines and institutions and his promotion of the “Religion of Humanity,” also depended largely on concerns about human cultivation and education. Though the Benthamite “philosophic radicals,” including Mill, took Christianity to be a particularly pernicious superstition that fostered indifference or hostility to human happiness (the keystone of utilitarian morality), Mill also thought that religion could potentially serve important ethical needs by supplying us with “ideal conceptions grander and more beautiful than we see realized in the prose of human life.” (CW, X.419). In so doing, religion elevates our feelings, cultivates sympathy with others, and imbues even our smallest activities with a sense of purpose.

The posthumously published three Essays on Religion (1874)—on “Nature,” the “Utility of Religion,” and “Theism”—criticized traditional religious views and formulated an alternative in the guise of the Religion of Humanity. Along with the criticism of religion’s moral effects that he shared with the Benthamites, Mill was also critical of the intellectual laziness that permitted belief in an omnipotent and benevolent God. He felt, following his father, that the world as we find it could not possibly have come from such a God given the evils rampant in it; either his power is limited or he is not wholly benevolent.

Beyond attacking arguments concerning the essence of God, Mill undermines a variety of arguments for his existence including all a priori arguments. He concludes that the only legitimate proof of God is an a posteriori and probabilistic argument from the design of the universe – the traditional argument (stemming from Aristotle) that complex features of the world, like the eye, are unlikely to have arisen by chance, hence there must be a designer. (Mill acknowledges the possibility that Darwin, in his 1859 The Origin of Species, has provided a wholly naturalistic explanation of such features, but he suggests that it is too early to judge of Darwin’s success).

Inspired by Comte, Mill finds an alternative to traditional religion in the Religion of Humanity, in which an idealized humanity becomes an object of reverence and the morally useful features of traditional religion are supposedly purified and accentuated. Humanity becomes an inspiration by being placed imaginatively within the drama of human history, which has a destination or point, namely the victory of good over evil. As Mill puts it, history should be seen as “the unfolding of a great epic or dramatic action,” which terminates “in the happiness or misery, the elevation or degradation, of the human race.” It is “an unremitting conflict between good and evil powers, of which every act done by any of us, insignificant as we are, forms one of the incidents.” (CW, XXI.244). As we begin to see ourselves as participants in this Manichean drama, as fighting alongside people like Socrates, Newton, and Jesus to secure the ultimate victory of good over evil, we become capable of greater sympathy, moral feeling, and an ennobled sense of the meaning of our own lives. The Religion of Humanity thereby acts as an instrument of human cultivation.

3. Conclusion

Mill’s intellect engaged with the world rather than fled from it. His was not an ivory tower philosophy, even when dealing with the most abstract of philosophical topics. His work is of enduring interest because it reflects how a fine mind struggled with and attempted to synthesize important intellectual and cultural movements. He stands at the intersections of conflicts between enlightenment and romanticism, liberalism and conservatism, and historicism and rationalism. In each case, as someone interested in conversation rather than pronouncement, he makes sincere efforts to move beyond polemic into sustained and thoughtful analysis. That analysis produced challenging answers to problems that still remain. Whether or not one agrees with his answers, Mill serves as a model for thinking about human problems in a serious and civilized way.

4. References and Further Reading

* = works of note.

Primary Texts

  • Bentham, Jeremy. Deontology together with A Table of the Springs of Action and The Article on Utilitarianism. Edited by Amnon Goldworth. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1983.
  • Bentham, Jeremy. An Introduction to the Principles of Morals and Legislation. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1996.
  • Bentham, Jeremy. The Works of Jeremy Bentham. Edited by John Bowring. 10 vols. New York: Russell and Russell, 1962.
  • Carlyle, Thomas. A Carlyle Reader. Edited by G.B. Tennyson. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1984.
  • Carlyle, Thomas. Critical and Miscellaneous Essays. Philadelphia: Casey and Hart, 1845.
  • Carlyle, Thomas. Past and Present. London: Ward, Lock, and Bowden, Ltd., 1897.
  • Coleridge, S.T.C. On the Constitution of the Church and State According to the Idea of Each (3rd Edition), and Lay Sermons (2nd Edition). London: William Pickering, 1839.
  • Comte, Auguste. A General View of Positivism. 1848. Reprint. Dubuque, Iowa: Brown Reprints, 1971.
  • Mill, James. An Analysis of the Phenomena of the Human Mind. Edited and with Notes by John Stuart Mill. London: Longmans, Green and Dyer, 1869.
  • *Mill, John Stuart. The Collected Works of John Stuart Mill. Gen. Ed. John M. Robson. 33 vols. Toronto: University of Toronto Press, 1963-91.
    • The standard scholarly editions including Mill’s published works, letters, and notes; an outstanding resource.
  • Mill, John Stuart. A System of Logic. New York: Harper & Brothers, 1874.
  • Mill, John Stuart. On Liberty. Peterborough, Canada: Broadview Press, 1999.
  • Paley, William. The Principles of Moral and Political Philosophy. Indianapolis: Liberty Press, 2002 [1785].

Secondary Texts

  • Britton, Karl. ‘John Stuart Mill on Christianity.’ In James and John Stuart Mill: Papers of the Centenary Conference, John Robson and Michael Laine (eds.). Toronto: University of Toronto Press, 1976.
  • *Capaldi, Nicholas. John Stuart Mill: A Biography. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2004.
    • A recent and very thorough treatment of Mill’s life and work.
  • Carlisle, Janice. John Stuart Mill and the Writing of Character. Athens, GA: University of Georgia Press, 1991.
  • Collini, Stefan. ‘The Idea of “Character” in Victorian Political Thought.’ Transactions of the Royal Historical Society, 5th series, 35 (1985), 29-50.
  • *Collini, Stefan. Public Moralists, Political Thought and Intellectual Life in Great Britain 1850-1930. Oxford: Clarendon, 1991.
    • A useful history that includes discussion of Mill’s intellectual and institutional context.
  • *Collini, Stefan, Donald Winch, and John Burrow. That Noble Science of Politics: A Study in Nineteenth-century Intellectual History. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1983.
    • Very valuable work on nineteenth century British political discourse; includes discussion of the Philosophic Radicals.
  • Donner, Wendy. The Liberal Self: John Stuart Mill’s Moral and Political Philosophy. Ithaca: Cornell Univ. Press, 1991.
  • Harrison, Brian. ‘State Intervention and Moral Reform in nineteeth-century England.’ In Pressure from Without in Early Victorian England, edited by Patricia Hollis, 289-322. New York: St. Martin’s Press, 1974.
  • *Halevy, Elie. The Growth of Philosophical Radicalism. Translated by Mary Morris. Boston: The Beacon Press, 1955.
    • Though originally published in 1904, this is still a seminal work in the history of utilitarianism.
  • Hamburger, Joseph. ‘Religion and “On Liberty.”’ In A Cultivated Mind: Essays on J.S. Mill Presented to John M. Robson, edited by Michael Laine, 139-81. Toronto: Univ. of Toronto Press, 1961.
  • Harrison, Ross. Bentham. London: Routledge and Kegan Paul, 1983.
  • Hedley, Douglas. Coleridge, Philosophy and Religion: Aids to Reflection and the Mirror of the Spirit. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2000.
  • Heydt, Colin. ‘Narrative, Imagination, and the Religion of Humanity in Mill’s Ethics.’ Journal of the History of Philosophy, vol. 44, no. I (Jan. 2006), 99-115.
  • Heydt, Colin. ‘Mill, Bentham, and “Internal Culture”.’ British Journal for the History of Philosophy, vol. 14, no. 2 (May 2006), 275-302.
  • Heydt, Colin. Rethinking Mill’s Ethics: Character and Aesthetic Education. London: Continuum Press, 2006.
  • *Hollander, Samuel. The Economics of John Stuart Mill (Toronto: UTP and Oxford: Blackwell), 1985: Volume I, Theory and Method. Volume II, Political Economy, 482-1030.
    • The seminal work on Mill’s economics.
  • Jenkyns, Richard. The Victorians and Ancient Greece. Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press, 1980.
  • Jones, H. S. ‘John Stuart Mill as Moralist.’ Journal of the History of Ideas 53 (1992): 287-308.
  • Kuklick, Bruce. ‘Seven thinkers and how they grew: Descartes, Spinoza, Leibniz; Locke, Berkeley, Hume; Kant.’ In Philosophy in History, Rorty, Schneewind, Skinner (eds.). Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1984.
  • *Mandelbaum, M. History, Man and Reason. Baltimore: Johns Hopkins Univ. Press, 1971.
    • An excellent intellectual history of Europe in the nineteenth century; contains very valuable discussions of Mill.
  • Matz, Lou. ‘The Utility of Religious Illusion: A Critique of J.S. Mill’s Religion of Humanity.’ Utilitas 12 (2000): 137-154.
  • Millar, Alan. ‘Mill on Religion.’ In The Cambridge Companion to Mill, John Skorupski (ed.). Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1998.
  • *Packe, Michael. The Life of John Stuart Mill. New York: MacMillan Company, 1954.
    • Prior to Capaldi’s, the standard life; still contains useful biographical detail.
  • Raeder, Linda C. John Stuart Mill and the Religion of Humanity. Columbia: University of Missouri Press, 2002.
  • Robson, John M. The Improvement of Mankind: The Social and Political Thought of John Stuart Mill. Toronto: Toronto Univ. Press, 1968.
  • Robson, John. ‘J.S. Mill’s Theory of Poetry.’ In Mill: A Collection of Critical Essays, J. B. Schneewind, (ed.). London: MacMillan, 1968.
  • Ryan, Alan. The Philosophy of John Stuart Mill. London: MacMillan, 1970.
  • *Ryan, Alan. J.S. Mill. London: Routledge and Kegan Paul, 1974.
    • A nice introduction to Mill’s writings and central arguments.
  • *Schneewind, J. B. Sidgwick’s Ethics and Victorian Moral Philosophy. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1977.
    • Still easily the best extant treatment of Victorian moral philosophy; includes extremely valuable examination of the conflict between utilitarianism and intuitionism.
  • Sen, Amartya, and Bernard Williams, eds. Utilitarianism and Beyond. Cambridge: Cambridge Univ. Press, 1982.
  • Shanely, Mary Lyndon. ‘Marital Slavery and Friendship: John Stuart Mill’s The Subjection of Women.’ Political Theory, Vol. 9, No. 2 (May 1981), 229-247.
  • Shanley, Mary Lyndon. ‘Suffrage, Protective Labor Legislation, and Married Women’s Property Laws in England.’ Signs, Vol. 12, No. 1 (1986).
  • *Skorupski, John. John Stuart Mill. London: Routledge, 1989.
    • Unquestionably, the best single book on Mill’s general philosophy.
  • Skorupski, John. ‘Introduction.’ In The Cambridge Companion to Mill, edited by John Skorupski. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1998.
  • *Skorupski, John (editor). The Cambridge Companion to Mill. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1998.
    • Includes a number of important articles and an extensive (though by now a little dated) bibliography.
  • Smart, J.J.C. ‘Extreme and Restricted Utilitarianism.’ The Philosophical Quarterly, (October 1956), 344-354.
  • *Thomas, William. The Philosophic Radicals: Nine Studies in Theory and Practice 1817-1841. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1979.
    • Very good resource for Philosophic Radicalism.
  • Turner, Michael J. “Radical Opinion in an Age of Reform: Thomas Perronet Thompson and the Westminster Review,” History, Vol. 86 (2001), Issue 281, 18-40.
  • Williams, Raymond. Culture and Society 1780-1950. New York: Columbia University Press, 1983.
  • *Wilson, Fred. Psychological Analysis and the Philosophy of John Stuart Mill. Toronto: Toronto Univ. Press, 1990.
    • Most thorough treatment of Mill’s psychological views.

Author Information

Colin Heydt
University of South Florida
U. S. A.

Anselm of Canterbury (1033—1109)

anselmSaint Anselm was one of the most important Christian thinkers of the eleventh century. He is most famous in philosophy for having discovered and articulated the so-called “ontological argument;” and in theology for his doctrine of the atonement. However, his work extends to many other important philosophical and theological matters, among which are: understanding the aspects and the unity of the divine nature; the extent of our possible knowledge and understanding of the divine nature; the complex nature of the will and its involvement in free choice; the interworkings of human willing and action and divine grace; the natures of truth and justice; the natures and origins of virtues and vices; the nature of evil as negation or privation; and the condition and implications of original sin.

In the course of his work and thought, unlike most of his contemporaries, Anselm deployed argumentation that was in most respects only indirectly dependent on Sacred Scripture, Christian doctrine, and tradition. Anselm also developed sophisticated analyses of the language used in discussion and investigation of philosophical and theological issues, highlighting the importance of focusing on the meaning of the terms used rather than allowing oneself to be misled by the verbal forms, and examining the adequacy of the language to the objects of investigation, particularly to the divine nature. In addition, in his work he both discussed and exemplified the resolution of apparent contradictions or paradoxes by making appropriate distinctions. For these reasons, one title traditionally accorded him is the Scholastic Doctor, since his approach to philosophical and theological matters both represents and contributed to early medieval Christian Scholasticism.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Influences
  3. Methodology: Faith and Reason
  4. The Proslogion
  5. Gaunilo’s Reply and Anselm’s Response
  6. The Monologion
  7. Cur Deus Homo
  8. De Grammatico
  9. The De Veritate
  10. The De Libertate Arbitrii
  11. The De Casu Diaboli
  12. The De Concordia
  13. The Fragments
  14. Other Writings
  15. References and Further Readings
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Life

Anselm was born in 1033 in Aosta, a border town of the kingdom of Burgundy. In his adolescence, he decided that there was no better life than the monastic one. He sought to become a monk, but was refused by the abbot of the local monastery. Leaving his birthplace as a young man, he headed north across the Alps to France, eventually arriving at Bec in Normandy, where he studied under the eminent theologian and dialectician Lanfranc, whose involvement in disputes with Berengar spurred a revival in theological speculation and application of dialectic in theological argument. At the monastery of Bec, Anselm devoted himself to scholarship, and found an earlier childhood attraction to the monastic life reawakening. Unable to decide between becoming a monk at Bec or Cluny, becoming a hermit, or living off his inheritance and giving alms to the poor, he put the decision in the hands of Lanfranc and Maurilius, the Archbishop of Rouen, who decided Anselm should enter monastic life at Bec, which he did in 1060.

In 1063, after Lanfranc left Bec for Caen, Anselm was chosen to be prior. Among the various tasks Anselm took on as prior was that of instructing the monks, but he also had time left for carrying on rigorous spiritual exercises, which would play a great role in his philosophical and theological development. As his biographer, Eadmer, writes: “being continually given up to God and to spiritual exercises, he attained such a height of divine speculation that he was able by God’s help to see into and unravel many most obscure and previously insoluble questions…” (1962, p. 12). He became particularly well known, both in the monastic community and in the wider community, not only for the range and depth of his insight into human nature, the virtues and vices, and the practice of moral and religious life, but also for the intensity of his devotions and asceticism.

In 1070, Anselm began to write, particularly prayers and meditations, which he sent to monastic friends and to noblewomen for use in their own private devotions. He also engaged in a great deal of correspondence, leaving behind numerous letters. Eventually, his teaching and thinking culminated in a set of treatises and dialogues. In 1077, he produced the Monologion, and in 1078 the Proslogion. Eventually, Anselm was elected abbot of the monastery. At some time while still at Bec, Anselm wrote the De Veritate (On Truth), De Libertate Arbitrii (On Freedom of Choice), De Casu Diaboli (On the Fall of the Devil), and De Grammatico.

In 1092, Anselm traveled to England, where Lanfranc had previously been arch-bishop of Canterbury. The Episcopal seat had been kept vacant so King William Rufus could collect its income, and Anselm was proposed as the new bishop, a prospect neither the king nor Anselm desired. Eventually, the king fell ill, changed his mind in fear of his demise, and nominated Anselm to become bishop. Anselm attempted to argue his unfitness for the post, but eventually accepted. In addition to the typical cares of the office, his tenure as arch-bishop of Canterbury was marked by nearly uninterrupted conflict over numerous issues with King William Rufus, who attempted not only to appropriate church lands, offices, and incomes, but even to have Anselm deposed. Anselm had to go into exile and travel to Rome to plead the case of the English church to the Pope, who not only affirmed Anselm’s position, but refused Anselm’s own request to be relieved of his office. While archbishop in exile, however, Anselm did finish his Cur Deus Homo, also writing the treatises Epistolae de Incarnatione Verbi (On the Incarnation of the Word), De Conceptu Virginali et de Originali Peccato (On the Virgin Conception and on Original Sin), De Processione Spiritus Sancti (On the Proceeding of the Holy Spirit), and De Concordia Praescientia et Praedestinationis et Gratiae Dei cum Libero Arbitrio (On the Harmony of the Foreknowledge, the Predestination, and the Grace of God with Free Choice).

Upon returning to England after William Rufus’s death, conflict eventually ensued between the archbishop and the new king, Henry I, requiring Anselm once again to travel to Rome. When judgment was made by Pope Paschal II in Anselm’s favor, the king forbade him to return to England, but eventually reconciliation took place. Anselm died in 1109, leaving behind several pupils and friends of some importance, among them Eadmer, Anselm’s biographer, and the theologian Gilbert Crispin. He was declared a doctor of the Roman Catholic Church in 1720, and is considered a saint by the Roman Catholic Church and the churches in the Anglican Communion.

Today, Anselm is most well known for his Proslogion proof for the existence of God, but his thought was widely known in the Middle Ages, and still today in certain circles of scholarship, particularly among religious scholars, for considerably more than that single achievement. For fuller biographies of Anselm, see Eadmer’s Vita Sancti AnselmiThe Life of St. Anselm: Archbishop of Canterbury, and Alexander’s Liber ex dictis beati Anselmi.

2. Influences

With the exception of St. Augustine, and to a lesser extent Boethius, it is difficult to definitively ascribe the influence of other thinkers to the development of St. Anselm’s thought. To be sure, Anselm studied under Lanfranc, but Lanfranc does not appear to have been a significant influence on the actual content or expression of Anselm’s thought, and he largely ignored Lanfranc’s misgivings about the method of theMonologion. Anselm cites Boethius, but does not draw upon him extensively. Other figures have been proposed as influences on Anselm, for instance John Scotus Eriugena and Pseudo-Dionysus, but any such proposals are set in the proper framework by these remarks from Koyré: “The influence of these two great thinkers is not at all lacking in verisimilitude a priori.” (Koyré 1923, 109). It is possible that either one of them, or other thinkers, influenced Anselm, but going beyond mere possibility given the texts we possess is controversial.

Discerning influences on Anselm’s work is for the most part conjectural, precisely because Anselm makes so few references to previous thinkers in his work. In the preface to the Monologion he writes: “Reexamining the work often myself, I have been able to find nothing that I have said in it, that would not agree [cohaereat] with the writings of the Catholic Fathers and especially with those of the blessed Augustine.” (S. v. 1, p.8)

[All citations of Anselm’s texts (except for the Fragments) are the author’s translations from S. Anselmi Cantuariensis Archepiscopi Opera Omnia, abbreviated here as S., followed by (when needed) the volume and the page numbers. Latin terms in brackets or parentheses have been romanized to current orthography. All citations of the Fragments are the author’s translations from the Ein neues unvollendetes Werk des heilige Anselm von Canterbury, henceforth abbreviated as u.W.]

Anselm references Augustine’s On the Holy Trinity, but as a whole work, giving no specific references. Clearly, Augustine was a major influence on Anselm’s thought, but that is in itself rather unremarkable, since practically all of his contemporaries fit in one way or another into the broad stream of the Augustinian tradition. As Southern summarizes the issues: “[T]he ambivalence of Anselm’s relations to St. Augustine remains one of the mysteries of his mind and personality. Augustine’s thought was the pervading atmosphere in which Anselm moved; but he was never content merely to reproduce Augustine.” (1963, 32)

In fact, one of the most important features of Anselm’s work is its originality. As Southern has also pointed out, this originality was not confined to the treatises and dialogues. In his more devotional prayers and meditations, Anselm adapted traditional forms to new content, (1963, 34-47) “open[ing] the way which led to the Dies Irae, the Imitatio Christi, and the masterpieces of later medieval piety.” (1963, 47) Although clearly indebted to an Augustinian (neo)-Platonic tradition often termed “Christian philosophy,” Anselm’s originality clearly furthered and expanded that tradition, and prepared the way for later Scholasticism. The term “Christian philosophy” was used in a variety of senses, particularly within and to denote the Augustinian tradition, and was applied to Anselm’s work by numerous interpreters. A set of debates, which gave rise to a sizable literature, and which are still to some extent being continued today, took place in Francophone circles (spreading to German, Italian, Spanish, and English-speaking circles in later years) in the early 1930s, about the nature and possibility of “Christian philosophy.” One of the main participants, Etienne Gilson, in fact used Anselm’s formula fides quaerens intellectum several times as one of the definitions of Christian philosophy.

Anselm’s work was influential for some of his contemporaries, and has continued to exercise influence in varying ways on philosophers and theologians to the present day. The so-called “ontological argument” has had numerous critics, defenders, and adaptors philosophically or theologically notable in their own right, among them St. Bonaventure, St. Thomas Aquinas, Descartes, Gassendi, Spinoza, Malebranche, Locke, Leibniz, Kant, Hegel, and an even greater number in the last century, not least of which were Charles Hartshorne, Etienne Gilson, Maurice Blondel, Martin Heidegger, Karl Barth, Norman Malcolm, and Alvin Plantinga. However, the “argument”(s) discussed in this literature are frequently not precisely what is found in Anselm’s texts, and a sizable literature has developed addressing that very issue.

Argument(s) for God’s being or existence form only a small portion of Anselm’s considerable and complex work, and his influence has been much wider and deeper than originating one perennial line of philosophical investigation and discussion. In his own time, he had several gifted students, among them Anselm of Laon, Gilbert Crispin, Eadmer (writer of the Vita Anselmi), Alexander (writer of the Dicta Anselmi), and Honorius Augustodunensis. His works were copied and disseminated in his lifetime, and exercised an influence on later Scholastics, among them Bonaventure, Thomas Aquinas, John Duns Scotus, and William of Ockham. For further discussion of Anselm’s influence, cf. Châtillon, 1959, Southern, 1963, Rovighi, 1964, Hopkins, 1972, and Fortin, 2001.

3. Methodology: Faith and Reason

The extent to which Anselm’s work, and which portions of it, ought to be considered to be philosophy or theology (or “philosophical theology,” “Christian philosophy,” and so forth) is a long debated question. The answers (and their rationales) depend considerably on one’s conceptions of philosophy and theology and their distinction and interaction. These admittedly important issues are set aside here in order to focus on three key features of Anselm’s work: Anselm’s pedagogical motivation and his intended audience; the notion of faith seeking understanding (fides quaerens intellectum); and Anselm’s stylistics and dialectic.

Anselm provides a paradigmatic account of the pedagogical motive structuring his works in theMonologion’s Prologue.

Some of the brothers have often and earnestly entreated me to set down in writing for them some of the matters I have brought to light for them when we spoke together in our accustomed discourses, about how the divine essence ought to be meditated upon and certain other things pertaining to that sort of meditation, as a kind of model for meditation.... They prescribed this form for me: nothing whatsoever in these matters should be made convincing [persuaderetur] by the authority of Scripture, but whatsoever the conclusion [finis], through individual investigations, should assert...the necessity of reason would concisely prove [cogeret], and the clarity of truth would evidently show that this is the case. They also wished that I not disdain to meet and address [obviare] simpleminded and almost foolish objections that occurred to me. (S. v. 1, p.7)

The original audience for his writings was fellow Benedictine monks seeking a fuller understanding of the Christian faith and asking that Anselm provide an articulation of it in a form quite different than those typical and traditional of their time, namely, where such theological discussions were carried out primarily through citation and interpretation of Scripture and patristic authorities. Anselm expresses this pedagogical motive again in the Cur Deus Homo: “I have often and most earnestly been asked by many, in speech and in writing, to commit in writing to posterity [memoriae. . commendem] reasonable answers [rationes] I am accustomed to give to those asking about a certain question of our faith.” (S. v. 2, p.47)

The goal of Anselm’s treatises is not to provide a philosophical substitute for the Christian faith, nor to rationalize or systematize it solely in the light of natural reason. Rather, in the cases of the Monologionand Proslogion, he aims to treat meditatively, by reason’s resources, central aspects of the Christian faith, namely, as he puts it in the Proslogion’s Prologue: “that God truly is, and that he is the supreme good needing no other, and that he is what all things need so that they are and so that they are well, and whatever else we believe about the divine substance.” (S., v. 1, p. 93) In the other treatises (excepting theDe Grammatico, which he explicitly states to be for “beginners in dialectic,” and that it “pertains to a different subject matter than [Sacred Scripture],” S., v.1, p. 173), Anselm concerns himself with other important, and often interrelated, aspects of the Christian faith, developing the arguments through reasoning, rather than through explicit reliance on Scriptural or patristic authority in the course of argumentation. Over the course of his career, Anselm’s intended audience expands considerably, however, particularly as he became involved in controversy over the Trinity that culminated in hisEpistola de Incarnatione Verbi and Cur Deus Homo.

The Proslogion’s Prologue provides a somewhat different, but clearly related motive for its production. After the Monologion, Anselm writes: “considering that that work was constructed from an interlinking [concatenatione] of many arguments, I began to wonder if perhaps a single argument [unum argumentum] that needed nothing other than itself alone for proving itself.” (S., v. 1, p. 93) Once he had uncovered this unum argumentum (“single argument”) after great effort and difficulty, Anselm wrote about it and several other related topics, in the interest of sharing the joy it had brought him, or at least pleasing another who would read it (alicui legenti placiturum).

Precisely what this single argument consists of has been a subject of considerable scholarly debate. A fairly common but clearly incorrect interpretation of the “single argument” takes it as referring only to the proof for God’s existence or being in Chapter 2, or at most Chapters 2-4. At the other extreme, some commentators take the single argument to be the entirety of the Proslogion. A third, intermediary position argues that the unum argumentum is the entirety of the Proslogion, minus the last three chapters, for two reasons: 1) Anselm calls the last three chapters coniectationes; 2) Anselm says in the prooemium that he wrote the Proslogion about the argument itself (de hoc ipso) and about several other things (et de quibusdam aliis).

As Anselm explains to his interlocutor Boso, his writing the De Conceptu Virginali is motivated by a purpose similar to that of the Proslogion, reexamining and rearticulating topics previously addressed in other works.

For I am certain that when you read in the Cur Deus Homo. . . that, besides the one I set down there, another reason can be glimpsed [posse uideri], how God took on humanity without sin from the sinful mass of the human race, your most studious mind will be driven not a little to asking what this reason is. Accordingly, I feared that I would appear unjust to you if I conceal what I think on this [quod inde mihi videtur] from your enjoyment [dilectioni tuae]. (S., v. 2, p. 139)

The prologue to the three connected dialogues (De VeritateDe Libertate ArbitriiDe Casu Diaboli) does not indicate conclusively whether they were written to answer specific requests of the monks. Clearly, however, they treat matters of both theological and philosophical interest arising out of reflection and discussion on Christian faith, life, and thought.

Fides quaerens intellectum, “faith seeking understanding” was the Proslogion’s original title and is an apt designation for Anselm’s philosophical and theological projects as a whole. Anselm begins from, and never leaves the standpoint of a committed and practicing Catholic Christian, but this does not mean that his philosophical work is thereby vitiated as philosophy by operating on the basis of and within the confines of theological presuppositions. Rather, Anselm engages in philosophy, employing reasoning rather than appeal to Scriptural or patristic authority in order to establish the doctrines of the Christian faith (which, as a faithful and practicing believer, he takes as already established) in a different, but possible way, through the employment of reason. Faith seeking understanding goes beyond simply establishing faith’s doctrines, however, precisely because it seeks understanding, the rational intelligibility (as far as is possible) of the doctrines.

Anselm does cite Scripture at certain points in his work, as well as “what we believe” (quod credimus), but attention to his texts indicates that he does not rely on scriptural or doctrinal authority directly to resolve problems or to provide starting points for his reasoning. In some cases, he has the student or his own questioning voice (as in Proslogion, Chapter 8) bring up Scriptural passages of truths of Christian doctrine in order to raise problems that require a rational resolution. In other cases (as in De Concordia, Book 1 Chapter 5), he does use Scriptural passages as starting points for arguments, but for erroneous arguments that he then criticizes. In yet other cases, Anselm brings up Scripture precisely to explain how certain passages or expressions should be rightly understood (as in the De Casu Diaboli, explaining how God causing evil should be understood). Lastly, Anselm cites Scripture after the course of his argument in order to reconnect the rational argumentation with Christian revelation (as in Proslogion, Chapter 16, where Anselm’s previous reasoning culminates in God “inhabiting” an “inaccessible light”). For discussion of Anselm and Scripture, cf. Barth, 1960, Tonini, 1970, and Henry, 1962.

In his actual exercise of reason, Anselm displays both confidence in reason’s capacity for providing understanding to faith, and awareness of the limitations human reason’s exercise eventually runs into and becomes aware of. For instance, in Proslogion, Chapter 15, he concludes that God is not only that than which nothing greater can be thought, but something greater than can be thought. Another important aspect of Anselm’s fides quaerens intellectum is that, in the Monologion, reason is employed by one who “disputes and investigates with himself things he had not previously taken notice of [non animadvertisset],” (S., v. 1, p. 8) and in the Proslogion, one “striving to raise his mind to the contemplation of God, and seeking to understand what he believes.” (S., v. 1, p. 94)

Despite Anselm’s deliberate employment of reason as a means to the truth about both the natural and the supernatural order, his rationalism is a mitigated one. Monologion Chapter 1 exemplifies this. Anselm’s assessment is that one could persuade oneself of the truths argued for in the Monologion by the use of one’s reason, but Anselm hastens to add: “I wish it to be understood [accipi] that, even if a conclusion is reached [concludatur] seemingly as necessary [quasi necessarium] from reasons that seem good to me, it is not that it is entirely [omnino] necessary, but only that for the current time [interim] it be said to be able to appear necessary.” (S., v. 1, p.14)

Chapter 64 of the Monologion provides another important discussion of the use of reason and argument. Anselm distinguishes between being able to understand or explain that something is true or that something exists, and being able to understand or explain how something is true. Since the divine substance, the triune God is ultimately beyond the capacities of human understanding, reason, or more precisely the reasoning human subject, must recognize both the limits and the capacities of reason.

I think that for someone investigating an incomprehensible matter it ought to be sufficient, if by reasoning towards it, he arrives at knowing that it most certainly does exist, even if he is unable to go further by use of the intellect [penetrare. . . intellectu] into how it is this way. Nor for that reason should we withhold the certainty of faith from those things that are asserted through necessary proofs [probationibus], and that are inconsistent with no other reason, if because of the incomprehensibility of their natural sublimity they do not allow themselves [non patiuntur] to be explained. (S., v. 1, p. 75)

Anselm is not skeptically questioning or undermining the capacities of reason and argumentation. Not every possible object the intellect attempts to engage with presents such problems, but only God. Accordingly, although a completely full and exhaustively systematic account cannot be provided of the divine substance, this does not undermine the certainty of what reason has been able to determine.

Stylistically, Anselm’s treatises take two basic forms, dialogues and sustained meditations. The former represent pedagogical discussions between a fairly gifted and inquisitive pupil and a teacher. In the latter, Anselm provides, as noted earlier, models of meditation, but the model differs considerably from theMonologion to the Proslogion, for in the first treatise, Anselm aims to provide a model of a person meditating, or (using Aristotle’s conception) engaging in dialectic with himself, while in the second case, the person addresses himself to the very God that he is attempting to comprehend as best as human capacities allow.

In the dialogue Cur Deus Homo, a student, Boso, “my brother and most beloved son” (S., v. 2, p. 139) is called by name. In the majority of the dialogues, the student and teacher are not named; it is clear, however, that the teacher represents Anselm and presents Anselm’s doctrines. The De Conceptu Virginali and the De Concordia are not written in the same dialogue form as the other treatises, but they are dialogical in their narrative voice(s), since Anselm addresses himself to another person (in the De Conceptu Virginali to Boso), articulating possible problems and objections his reader might make in order to address them.

The dialogue form serves a pedagogical purpose and reflects the project of fides quaerens intellectum, exemplified well by this passage from the De Casu Diaboli: “[L]et it not weary you to briefly reply to my silly questioning [fatuae interrogationi], so that I might know how I should respond to someone asking me the very same thing. Indeed, it is not always easy to respond wisely [sapienter] to someone who is asking foolishly [insipienter].” (S., v. 1, p. 275)

Interestingly, it appears that a recurring problem for Anselm was his treatises being copied and circulated without his authorization and before their final and finished state. He asserts this to be the case with the three connected dialogues and the Cur Deus Homo.

The following sections provide discussions of, and excerpts from, many of Anselm’s key works. With the exception of the ProslogionMonologion, and Cur Deus Homo, the works are examined in chronological order (as best as we know it). These three works are discussed first and in this order because the Proslogion has garnered the most attention from philosophers (more than the earlierMonologion, with which it shares similar aims and content) and the Cur Deus Homo likewise has garnered more attention from theologians than the earlier three dialogues “pertaining to study of Sacred Scripture” (S., v.1, p. 173) (the De VeritateDe Libertate Arbitrii, and De Casu Diaboli).

4. The Proslogion

In the Proslogion, Anselm intended to replace the many interconnected arguments from his previous and much longer work, the Monologion, with a single argument. Since the unum argumentum is supposed to prove not only that God exists, but other matters about God as well, as noted above, there is some scholarly controversy as to exactly what the argument is in the Proslogion’s text. Clearly, the so-called “ontological argument” for God’s existence in Chapter 2 plays a central role. It must be pointed out that Anselm nowhere uses the term “ontological argument,” nor in fact do the critics or proponents of the argument until Kant’s time. It has unfortunately become so ingrained in our philosophical vocabulary, especially in Anglophone Anselm scholarship, however, that it would be pedantic to insist on not using it at all. An interesting and sizable recent literature has developed explicitly contesting the appellation “ontological” applied to Anselm’s Proslogion proof(s) of God’s being or existence, a partial bibliography of which is provided in McEvoy, 1994.

Noting that God is believed to be something than which nothing greater can be thought (quo maius cogitari non potest), Anselm asks whether such a thing exists, since the Fool of the Psalms has said in his heart that there is no God.

But certainly that very same Fool, when he hears this very expression I say [hoc ipsum quod dico]: “something than which nothing greater can be thought,” understands what he hears; and what he understands is in his understanding [in intellectu], even if he does not understand that thing to exist. For it is one thing to be in the understanding, and another to understand a thing to exist. . . . . Therefore even the fool is compelled to admit [convincitur] that there is in his understanding something than which nothing greater can be thought, since when he hears this he understands it, and whatever is understood is in the understanding. And certainly that than which a greater cannot be thought cannot exist in the understanding alone. For if it is in the intellect alone [in solo intellectu], it can be thought to also be in reality [in re], which is something greater. If, therefore, that than which a greater cannot be thought is in the intellect alone, that very thing than which a greater cannot be thought is that than which a greater can be thought. But surely that cannot be. Therefore, without a doubt, something than which a greater cannot be thought exists [exsistit] both in the understanding and in reality. (S., v. 1, p. 101-2)

In Chapter 3, Anselm continues the argumentation, providing what some commentators take to be a second ontological argument.

And, it so truly exists that it cannot be thought not to be. For, a thing, which cannot be thought not to be (which is greater than what cannot be thought not to be), can be thought to be. So, if that than which a greater cannot be thought can be thought not to be, that very thing than which a greater cannot be thought is not that than which a greater cannot be thought, which cannot be compatible [convenire, i.e. with the thing being such]. Therefore, there truly is something than which a greater cannot be thought, and it cannot be thought not to be. (S., p. 102-3)

Addressing himself to God, Anselm explains why God cannot be thought not to exist, indicating why God uniquely has this status. “[I]f some mind could think something better than you, the creature would ascend over the Creator, and would engage in judgment about the Creator, which is quite absurd. And anything else whatsoever other than yourself can be thought not to exist. For you alone are the most true of all things, and thus you have being to the greatest degree [maxime], for anything else is not so truly [as God], and for this reason has less of being.” (S., p. 103) This raises a puzzle, however. Why does the Fool not only doubt whether God exists, but assert that there is no God? One possible, but rather circular answer is provided at the end of Chapter 3. “Why else, except because he is stupid and a fool?” (S., p. 103) As Anselm knows, however, that does not really answer the question. Chapter 4 provides an answer. The Fool both does and does not think [cogitare] that God does not exist, since there are two senses of “think”:

A thing is thought of in one way when one thinks of the word [vox] signifying it, in another way when what the thing itself is is understood. Therefore, in the first way it can be thought that God does not exist, but in the second way not at all. Indeed no one who understands that which God is can think that God is not, even though he says these words in his heart, either without any signification or with some other signification not properly applying to God [aliqua extranea significatione]. (S., p. 103-104)

Proslogion Chapters 5-26 deal progressively with the divine attributes, 5-23 either continuing or building off of the argument, and 24-26 being connected conjectures about God’s goodness. In Chapter 5, Anselm deduces attributes of God from the same “than which nothing greater can be thought” he used in Chapters 2-4.

What then are you, Lord God, that than which nothing greater can be thought? But what are you if not that which is the greatest of all things, who alone exists through himself, who made everything else from nothing? For whatever is not this, is less than what can be thought. But this cannot be thought about you. For what good is lacking to the supreme good, through which every good thing is? And so, you are just, truthful, happy, and whatever it is better to be than not to be. (S., p. 104)

These attributes of God, what it is better to be than not to be, are filled out in Chapter 6 (percipient, omnipotent, merciful, impassible), Chapter 11 (living, wise, good, happy, eternal), and Chapter 18 (an unity).

In Chapter 18, Anselm argues from God’s superlative unity to the unity of his attributes. “[Y]ou are so much a kind of unity [unum quiddam] and identical to yourself, that you are dissimilar to yourself in no way; indeed, you are that very unity, divisible by no understanding. Therefore, life and wisdom and the other [attributes] are not parts of you but all of them are one, and each of them is entirely what you are, and what the other [attributes] are.” (S., p. 115)

In Chapter 23, he employs this notion of superlative unity to explain how God can be a Trinity, indicating that all of the persons of the Trinity share equally and completely in the divine attributes. In the divine unity, the second person of the Trinity, the Son, or the Word is coequal to the first person, “Truly, there cannot be anything other than what you are, or anything greater or lesser than you in the Word by which you speak yourself; for your Word is true [verum] in the same way that you are truthful [quomodo tu verax], and for that reason he is the very same truth as you, not other than you.” (S., p. 117) The same holds for the third person of the Trinity, which is “the one love, common to you and your Son, that is, the Holy Spirit who proceeds from both.” (S., p. 117) Accordingly, for each of the persons of the Trinity, “what any of them is individually is at the same time the entire Trinity, the Father and the Son and the Holy Spirit; for, any one of them individually is not something other than the supremely simple unity and the supremely one simplicity, which cannot be multiplied or be one thing different from another.” (S., p. 117)

There are five other main matters that Anselm addresses in the Proslogion, the first three of which are sets of problems stemming from seeming incompatibilities in the divine attributes. Anselm puts these questions in Chapter 6. “How can you be perceptive [es sensibilis] if you are not a body? How can you be omnipotent, if you cannot do everything? How can you be merciful and impassible at the same time?” (S., p. 104) Anselm deals with the first briefly in Chapter 6, proposing that perceiving is knowing (cognoscere) or aimed at knowing (ad cognoscendum), so that God is supremely perceptive without knowing things through the type of sensibility human beings and animals have.

The argumentation of Chapter 7 is particularly important. There are things that God cannot do, for instance lying, being corrupted, making what is true to be false or what has been done to not be done. It seems that a truly omnipotent being ought to be able to do these things. To be able to do such things, Anselm suggests, is not really to have a power (potentia), but really a kind of powerlessness (impotentia). “For one who can do these things, can do what is not advantageous to oneself and what one ought not do. The more a person can do these things, the more adversity and perversity can do against that person, and the less that person can do against these.” (S., p. 105) So, one who does these things does them through powerlessness, through having one’s agency subjected to that of something other, rather than through one’s power. This, as Anselm explains, relies on an inexact manner of speaking, where one expresses powerlessness or inability as a kind of power or ability

In Chapters 8-11, through a longer and more sustained argument, Anselm answers the third question explaining how God can be both merciful and just at the same time. The explanation rests on God’s mercy stemming from his goodness, which is not ultimately something different from God’s justice, and which can be reconciled with it. Anselm concludes in Chapter 12: “But certainly, whatever you are, you are not through another but through yourself. Accordingly, you are the very life by which you live, and the wisdom by which you are wise, and the goodness by which you are good to good people and bad people; and likewise with similar attributes.” (S., p. 110) For God to be merciful to, forgive, and therefore not render justice to all transgressors, or likewise for God to not extend mercy, forgive, and therefore render justice to all transgressors would be for God to be something lesser than He is. It is, in effect, greater to be able to be just and merciful at the same time, which is possible for God precisely because justice and goodness coincide only in God. At the same time, Anselm concedes that when it comes to understanding precisely why God mercifully forgives of justly rendered judgment in a particular case is beyond our human capacities. For further discussion of Chapters 8-11, cf. Bayart, 1937, Corbin, 1988, and Sadler, 2006.

The fourth main issue, discussed in Chapters 14-17, has to do with our limited knowledge of God, which stems both from human sinfulness and God’s dazzling splendor. Again, as in Chapter 4, one can say that something is and is not the case at the same time, because it is being said in different and distinguishable ways. “If [my soul] did not see you [God], then it did not see the light or the truth. But, is not the truth and the light what it saw and yet did it still not yet see you, since it saw you only in a certain way [aliquatenus] but did not see you exactly as you are [sicuti es]?” (S., p. 111)

The reason the human soul does not see God directly is twofold, stemming both from finite human nature and from infinite divine nature. “But certainly [the human mind] is darkened in itself, and it is dazzled [reverbetur] by you. It is obscured by its own shortness of view [sua brevitate], and it is overwhelmed by your immensity. Truly it is restricted [contrahitur] in by its own narrowness, and it is overcome [vincitur] by your grandeur.” (S., p. 112) For this reason, in Chapter 15, Anselm concludes that God is in fact “greater than can be thought” (maior quam cogitari potest).

Finally, in Chapters 18-21, Anselm discusses God’s eternity. Anselm first indicates that God’s eternity is such that God is entirely present whenever and wherever God is, which is to say everywhere and at all times. Then, in Chapter 19, he begins to articulate the implications of God’s eternity more fully, ultimately leading into a transformation of perspective. Just as it is not the case that there is eternity and God happens to be in and is therefore eternal, since the reality is that God is eternity itself, God is not in every time or place, but rather everything, all times and places, is in God, that is, in God’s eternity.

5. Gaunilo’s Reply and Anselm’s Response

Gaunilo, a monk from the Abbey of Marmoutier, while noting the value of the remainder of theProslogion, attacked its argument for God’s existence on several counts. His arguments prefigure many arguments made by later philosophers against ontological arguments for God’s existence, and Anselm’s responses provide additional insight into the Proslogion argument. Gaunilo makes four main objections, and in each case, Gaunilo transposes Anselm’s “that than which nothing greater can be thought” into “that which is greater than everything else that can be thought.”

Gaunilo asserts that an additional argument is needed to move from this being having been thought to it being impossible for it not to be. “It needs to be proven to me by some other undoubtable argument that this being is of such a sort that as soon as it is thought its undoubtable existence is perceived with certainty by the understanding.” (S., v. 1, p. 126) He brings up this need for a further, unsupplied, argument twice more in his Reply, and in the last instance discusses what is really at issue. The Fool can say: “[W]hen did I say that in the truth of the matter [rei veritate] there was such a thing that is ‘greater than everything?’ For first, by some other completely certain argument, some superior nature must be proven to exist, that is, one greater or better than everything that exists, so that from this we could prove all the other things that cannot be lacking to what is greater or better than everything else.” (S., p. 129)

A second problem is whether one can actually understand what is supposed to be understood in order for the argument to work because God is unlike any creature, anything that we have knowledge or a conception of . “When I hear ‘that which is greater than everything that can be thought,’ which cannot be said to be anything other than God himself, I cannot think it or have it in the intellect on the basis of something I know from its species or genus. . . . For I neither know the thing itself, nor can I form an idea of it from something similar.” (S., p. 126-7)

Gaunilo continues along this line, arguing that the verbal formula employed in the argument is merely that, a verbal formula. The formula cannot really be understood, so it does not then really exist in the understanding. The signification or meaning of the terms can be thought, “but not as by a person who knows what is typically signified by this expression [voce], i.e. by one who thinks it on the basis of a thing that is true at least in thought alone.” (S., p. 127) Instead, what is actually being thought, according to Gaunilo, is vague. The signification or meaning of the terms is grasped only in a groping manner. “[I]t is thought as by one who does not know the thing and simply thinks on the basis of a movement of the mind produced by hearing this expression, trying to picture to himself the meaning of the expression perceived.” (S., p. 127) From this, Gaunilo concludes what he takes to be a denial of one of the premises of the argument: “So much then for the notion that that supreme nature is said to already exist in my understanding.” (S., p. 127)

A third problem that Gaunilo raises is that the argument could be applied to things other than God, things that are clearly imaginary, so that, if the argument were valid, it could be used to prove much more than Anselm intended, namely falsities. Here, the example of the Lost Island is introduced. “You can no longer doubt that this island excelling [praestantiorem] all other lands truly exists somewhere in reality, this island that you do not doubt to exist in your understanding; and since it is more excellent not to be in the understanding alone but also to be in reality, so it is necessary that it exists, since, if it did not, any other land that exists in reality would be more excellent than it.” (S., p. 128)

Anselm’s responses are long, detailed, and dense. Anselm notes Gaunillo’s alteration of the terms of the argument, and that this affects the force of the argument.

You repeat often that I say that, because what is greater than everything else [maius omnibus] is in the understanding, if it is the understanding it is in reality – for otherwise what is greater than everything else would not be greater than everything else – but such a proof [probatio] is found nowhere in all of the things I have said. For, saying “that which is greater than all” and “that than which nothing greater can be thought” do not have the same value for proving that what is being talked about is in reality. (S., p. 134)Therefore if, from what is said to be “greater than everything,” what “that than which nothing greater can be thought” proves of itself through itself [de se per seipsum] cannot be proved in a similar way, you have unjustly criticized me for having said what I did not say, when this differs so much from what I did say. (S., p. 135)

In Anselm’s view, Gaunilo demands a further argument precisely because he has not understood the argument as Anselm presented it. Anselm also affirms that we can understand the meaning of the term, “that than which nothing greater can be thought,” and that it is not simply a verbal formula.

Again, that you say that, when you hear it, you are not able to think or have in your mind “that than which a greater cannot be thought” on the basis of something known from its species or genus, so that you neither know the thing itself, nor can you form an idea of it from something similar. But quite evidently the matter is and remains otherwise [aliter sese habere]. For, every lesser good, insofar as it is good, is similar to a greater good. It is apparent to any reasonable mind that by ascending from lesser goods to greater ones, from those than which something greater can be thought, we are able to infer much [multum. . .conjicere] about that than which nothing greater can be thought. (S., p. 138)

Anselm notes a similarity between the terms “ineffable,” “unthinkable,” and “that than which nothing greater can be thought,” for in each case, it can be impossible for us to think or understand the thing referred to by the expression, but the expression can be thought and understood. Earlier on, Anselm makes a distinction that sheds additional light on this distinction between thinking and understanding the expression, and thinking and understanding the thing referred to by the expression. He also employs a useful metaphor. “[I]f you say that what is not entirely understood is not understood and is not in the understanding: say, then, that since someone is not able to gaze upon the purest light of the sun does not see light that is nothing but sunlight.” (S., p. 132) We do not have to fully and exhaustively understand what a term refers to in order for us to understand the term, and that applies to this case. “Certainly ‘that than which a greater cannot be thought’ is understood and is in the understanding at least to the extent [hactenus] that these things are understood of it.” (S., p. 132)

Anselm also clarifies the scope of his argument, indicating that it applies only to God: “I say confidently that if someone should find for me something existing either in reality or solely in thought, besides ‘that than which a greater cannot be thought,’ to which the schematic framework [conexionem] of my argument could rightly be adapted [aptare valeat], I will find and give him this lost island, nevermore to be lost.” (S., p. 134)

6. The Monologion

This earlier and considerably longer work includes an argument for God’s existence, but also much more discussion of the divine attributes and economy, and some discussion of the human mind. The proof Anselm provides in Chapter 1 is one he considers easiest for a person

who, either because of not hearing or because of not believing, does not know of the one nature, greatest of all things that are, alone sufficient to itself in its eternal beatitude, and who by his omnipotent goodness gives to and makes for all other things that they are something or that in some way they are well [aliquomodo bene sunt], and of the great many other things that we necessarily believe about God or about what he has created. (S., v. 1, p. 13)

The Monologion proof argues from the existence of many good things to a unity of goodness, a one thing through which all other things are good. Anselm first asks whether the diversity of good we experience through our senses and through our mind’s reasoning are all good through one single good thing, or whether there are different and multiple good things through which they are good. He recognizes, of course, that there are a variety of ways for things to be good things, and he also recognizes that many things are in fact good through other things. But, he is pushing the question further, since for every good thing B through which another good thing A is good, one can still ask what that good thing B is good through. If goods can even be comparable as goods, there must be some more general and unified way of regarding their goodness, or that through which they are good. Anselm argues: “you are not accustomed to considering something good except on an account of some usefulness, as health and those things that conduce to health are said to be good [propter aliquam utilitatem], or because of being of intrinsic value in some way [propter quamlibet honestatem], just as beauty and things that contribute to beauty are esteemed to be a good.” (S., p. 14)

This being granted, usefulness and intrinsic values can be brought to a more general unity. “It is necessary, for all useful or intrinsically valuable things, if they are indeed good things, that they are good through this very thing, through which all goods altogether [cuncta bona] must exist, whatever this thing might be.” (S., p. 14-5) This good alone is good through itself. All other good things are ultimately good through this thing, which is the superlative or supreme good. Certain corollaries can be drawn from this. One is that all good things are not only good through this Supreme Good; they are good, that is to say they have their being from the Supreme Good. Another is that “what is supremely good [summe bonum] is also supremely great [summe magnum]. Accordingly, there is one thing that is supremely good and supremely great, i.e. the highest [summum] of all things that are.” (S., p. 15) In Chapter 2, Anselm clarifies what he means by “great,” making a point that will assume greater importance in Chapter 15: “But, I am speaking about ‘great’ not with respect to physical space [spatio], as if it is some body, but rather about things that are greater [maius] to the degree that they are better [melius] or more worthy [dignus], for instance wisdom.” (S., p. 15)

Chapter 3 provides further discussion of the ontological dependence of all beings on this being. For any thing that is or exists, there must be something through which it is or exists. “For, everything that is, either is through [per] something or through nothing. But nothing is through nothing. For, it cannot be thought [non. . .cogitari potest] that something should be but not through something. So, whatever is, only is through something.” (S., p. 15-6) Anselm considers and rejects several possible ways of explaining how it is that all things are. There could be one single being through which all things have their being. Or there could be a plurality of beings through which other beings have their being. The second possibility allows three cases: “[I]f they are multiple, then either: 1) they are referred to some single thing through which they are, or 2) they are, individually [singula], through themselves [per se], or 3) they are mutually through each other [per se invicem].” (S., p. 16)

In the first case, they are all through one single being. In the second case, there is still some single power or nature of existing through oneself [existendi per se], common to all of them. Saying that they exist through themselves really means that they exist through this power or nature which they share. Again, they have one single ontological ground upon which they are dependent. One can propose the third case, but it is upon closer consideration absurd. “Reason does not allow that there would be many things [that have their being] mutually through each other, since it is an irrational thought that some thing should be through another thing, to which the first thing gives its being.” (S., p. 16)

For Anselm three things follow from this. First, there is a single being through which all other beings have their being. Second, this being must have its being through itself. Third, in the gradations of being, this being is to the greatest degree.

Whatever is through something else is less than that through which everything else together is, and that which alone is through itself. . . . So, there is one thing that alone, of all things, is, to the greatest degree and supremely [maxime et summe]. For, what of all things is to the greatest degree, and through which anything else is good or great, and through which anything else is something, necessarily that thing is supremely good and supremely great and the highest of all things that are. (S., p. 16)

Chapter 4 continues this discussion of degrees. In the nature of things, there are varying degrees (gradus) of dignity or worth (dignitas). The example Anselm uses is humorous and indicates an important feature of the human rational mind, namely its capacity to grasp these different degrees of worth. “For, one who doubts whether a horse in its nature is better than a piece of wood, and that a human being is superior to a horse, that person assuredly does not deserve to be called a human being.” (S., p. 17) Anselm argues that there must be a highest nature, or rather a nature that does not have a superior, otherwise the gradations would be infinite and unbounded, which he considers absurd. By argumentation similar to that of the previous chapters, he adduces that there can only be one such highest nature. The scale of gradations comes up again later in Chapter 31, where he indicates that creatures’ degrees of being, and being superior to other creatures, depends on their degree of likeness to God (specifically to the divine Word).

[E]very understanding judges natures in any way living to be superior to non-living ones, sentient natures to be superior to non-sentient ones, rational ones to be superior to irrational ones. For since the Supreme Nature, in its own unique manner, not only is but also lives and perceives and is rational, it is clear that. . . what in any way is living is more alike to the Supreme Nature than that which does not in any way live; and, what in any way, even by bodily sense, knows something is more like the Supreme Nature than what does not perceive at all; and, what is rational is more like the Supreme Nature than what is not capable of reason. (S., p. 49)

Through something akin to what analytic philosophers might term a thought-experiment and phenomenologists an eidetic variation, Anselm considers a being gradually stripped of reason, sentience, life, and then the “bare being” (nudum esse) that would be left: “[T]his substance would be in this way bit by bit destroyed, led by degrees (gradatim) to less and less being, and finally to non-being. And, those things that, when they are taken away [absumpta] one by one from some essence, reduce it to less and less being, when they are reassumed [assumpta] . . . lead it to greater and greater being.” (S., p. 49-50)

In the chapters that follow, Anselm indicates that the Supreme Nature derives its existence only from itself, meaning that it was never brought into existence by something else. Anselm uses an analogy to suggest how the being of the Supreme Being can be understood.

Therefore in what way it should be understood [intelligenda est] to be through itself and from itself [per se et ex se], if it does not make itself, not arise as its own matter, nor in any way help itself to be what it was not before?. . . .In the way “light” [lux] and “to light” [lucere] and “lighting” [lucens] are related to each other [sese habent ad invicem], so are “essence” [essentia] and “to be” [esse] and “being,” i.e. supremely existing or supremely subsisting. (S., p. 20)

This Supreme Nature is that through which all things have their being precisely because it is the Creator, which creates all beings (including the matter of created beings) ex nihilo.

In Chapters 8-14, the argument shifts direction, leading ultimately to a restatement of the traditional Christian doctrine of the Logos (the “Word” of God, the Son of the Father and Creator). The argumentation starts by examination of the meaning of “nothing,” distinguishing different senses and uses of the term. Creation ex nihilo could be interpreted three different ways. According to the first way, “what is said to have been made from nothing has not been made at all.” (S., p. 23) In another way, “something was said to be made from nothing in this way, that it was made from this very nothing, that is from that which is not; as if this nothing were something existing, from which something could be made.” (S., p. 23) Finally, there is a “third interpretation. . . when we understand something to be made but that there is not something from which it has been made.” (S., p. 23)

The first way, Anselm says, cannot be properly applied to anything that actually has been made, and the second way is simply false, so the third way or sense is the correct interpretation. In Chapter 9, an important implication of creation ex nihilo is drawn out “There is no way that something could come to be rationally from another, unless something preceded the thing to be made in the maker’s reason as a model, or to put it better a form, or a likeness, or a rule.” (S., p. 24) This, in turn implies another important doctrine: “what things were going to be, or what kinds of things or how the things would be, were in the supreme nature’s reason before everything came to be.” (S., p. 24) In subsequent chapters, the doctrine is further elaborated, culminating in this pattern being the utterance (locutio) of the supreme essence and the supreme essence, that is to say the Word (verbum) of the Father, while being of the same substance as the Father.

Chapter 15-28 examine, discuss, and argue for particular attributes of God, 15-17 and 28 being of particular interest. Chapter 15 is devoted to the matter of what can be said about the divine substance. Relative terms do not really communicate the essence of the divine being, even including expressions such as “the highest of all” (summa omnium) or “greater than everything that has been created by it” (maior omnibus . . .) “For if none of those things ever existed, in relation to which [God] is called “the highest” and “greater,” it would be understood to be neither the highest nor greater. But still, it would be no less good on that account, nor would it suffer any loss of the greatness of its essence. And this is obvious, for this reason: whatever may be good or great, this thing is not such through another but by its very self.” (S., p. 28)

There are still other ways of talking about the divine substance. One way is to say that the divine substance is “whatever is in general [omnino] better that what is not it. For, it alone is that than which nothing is better, and that which is better than everything else that is not what it is.” (S., p. 29) Given that explanation, while there are some things that it is better for certain beings to be rather than not to be, God will not be those things, but only what it is absolutely better to be than not to be. So, for instance, God will not be a body, but God will be wise or just. Anselm provides a partial listing of the qualities or attributes that do express the divine essence: “living, wise, powerful and all-powerful, true, just, happy, eternal, and whatever in like wise it is absolutely better to be than not to be.” (S., p. 29)

Anselm raises a problem in Chapter 16. Granted that God has these attributes, one might think that all that is being signified is that God is a being that has these attributes to a greater degree than other beings, not what God is. Anselm uses justice as the example, which is fitting since it is usually conceived of as something relational. Anselm first sets out the problem in terms of participation in qualities. “[E]verything that is just is just through justice, and similarly for other things of this sort. Accordingly, that very supreme nature is not just unless through justice. So, it appears that by participation in the quality, namely justice, the supremely good substance can be called just.” (S., p. 30) And this reasoning leads to the conclusion that the supremely good substance “is just through another, and not through itself.” (S., p. 30)

The problem is that God is what he is through himself, while other things are what they are through him. In the case of each divine attribute, as in the later Proslogion, God having that attribute is precisely that attribute itself, so that for instance, God is not just by some standard or idea of justice extrinsic to God himself, but rather God is God’s own justice, and justice in the superlative sense. Everything else canhave the attribute of justice, whereas God is justice. This argument can be extended to all of God’s attributes What is perceived to have been settled in the case of justice, the intellect is constrained by reason to judge [sentire] to be the case about everything that is said in a similar way about that supreme nature. Whichever of them, then, is said about the supreme nature, it is not how [qualis] nor how much [quanta] [the supreme nature has quality] that is shown [monstratur] but rather what it is. . . .Thus, it is the supreme essence, supreme life, supreme reason, supreme salvation [salus], supreme justice, supreme wisdom, supreme truth, supreme goodness, supreme greatness, supreme beauty, supreme immortality, supreme incorruptibility, supreme immutability, supreme happiness, supreme eternity, supreme power [potestas], supreme unity, which is nothing other than supreme being, supremely living, and other things in like wise [similiter]. (S., p. 30-1)

This immediately raises yet another problem, however, because this seems like a multiplicity of supreme attributes, implying that each is a particularly superlative way of being for God, suggesting that God is in some manner a composite. Instead, in God (not in any other being) each of these is all of the others. God’s being alone, as Chapter 28 argues, is being in an unqualified sense. All other beings, since they are mutable, or because they can be understood to have come from non-being, “barely (vix) exist or almost (fere) do not exist.” (S., p. 46)

Chapters 29-48 continue the investigation of the generation of the “utterance” or Word, the Son, from the Father in the divine economy, and 49-63 expand this to discussion of the love between the Father and the Son, namely the Holy Spirit, equally God as the Father and Son. 64-80 discuss the human creature’s grasp and understanding of God. Chapter 31 is of particular interest, and discusses the relationship between words or thoughts in human minds and the Word or Son by which all things were created by the Father. A human mind contains images or likenesses of things that are thought of or talked about, and a likeness is true to the degree that it imitates more or less the thing of which it is likeness, so that the thing has a priority in truth and in being over the human subject apprehending it, or more properly speaking, over the image, idea, or likeness by which the human subject apprehends the thing. In the Word, however, there are not likenesses or images of the created things, but instead, the created things are themselves imitations of their true essences in the Word.

The discussion in Chapters 64-80, which concludes the Monologion, makes three central points. First, the triune God is ineffable, and except in certain respects incomprehensible, but we can arrive at this conclusion and understand it to some degree through reason. This is because our arguments and investigations do not attain the distinctive character (proprietatem) of God. That does not present an insurmountable problem, however.

For often we talk about many things that we do not express properly, exactly as they really are, but we signify through another thing what we will not or can not bring forth properly, as for instance when we speak in riddles. And often we see something, not properly, exactly how the thing is, but through some likeness or image, for instance when we look upon somebody’s face in a mirror. Indeed, in this way we talk about and do not talk about, see and do not see, the same thing. We talk about it and see it through something else; we do not talk about it and see it through its distinctive character [proprietatem]Now, whatever names seem to be able to be said of this nature, they do not so much reveal it to me through its distinctive character as signify it [innuunt] to me through some likeness. (S., v. 1, p. 76)

Anselm uses the example of the divine attribute of wisdom. “For the name ‘wisdom’ is not sufficient to reveal to me that being through which all things were made from nothing and preserved from [falling into] nothing.” (S., p. 76)

The outcome of this is that all human thought and knowledge about God is mediated through something. Likenesses are never the thing of which they are a likeness, but there are greater and lesser degrees of likeness. This leads to the second point. Human beings come closer to knowing God through investigating what is closer to him, namely the rational mind, which is a mirror both of itself and, albeit in a diminished way, of God.

[J]ust as the rational mind alone among all other creatures is able to rise to the investigation of this Being, likewise it is no less alone that through which the rational mind itself can make progress towards investigation of that Being. For we have already come to know [jam cognitum est] that the rational mind, through the likeness of natural essence, most approaches that Being. What then is more evident than that the more assiduously the rational mind directs itself to learning about itself, the more effectively it ascends to the knowledge [cognitionem] of that Being, and that the more carelessly it looks upon itself, the more it descends from the exploration [speculatione] of that Being? (S., v. 1, p. 77)

Third, to be truly rational involves loving and seeking God, which in fact requires an effort to remember and understand God. “[I]t is clear that the rational creature ought to expend all of its capacity and willing [suum posse et velle] on remembering and understanding and loving the Supreme Good, for which purpose it knows itself to have its own being.” (S., p. 79)

7. Cur Deus Homo

The Monologion and Proslogion (although often only Chapters 2-4 of the latter) are typically studied by philosophers. The Cur Deus Homo (Why God Became Man) is more frequently studied by theologians, particularly since Anselm’s interpretation of the Atonement has been influential in Christian theology. The method, however, as in his other works, is primarily a philosophical one, attempting to understand truths of the Christian faith through the use of reasoning, granted of course, that this reasoning is applied to theological concepts. Anselm provides a twofold justification for the treatise, both responding to requests “by speech and by letter.” The first is for those asking Anselm to discuss the Incarnation, providing rational accounts (rationes) “not so that through reason they attain to faith, but so that they may delight in the understanding and contemplation of those things they believe, and so that they might be, as much as possible, 'always ready to satisfy all those asking with an account [rationem] for those things for which' we 'hope.'” (S., v. 2, p. 48)

The second is for those same people, but so that they can engage in argument with non-Christians. As Anselm says, non-believers make the question of the Incarnation a crux in their arguments against Christianity, “ridiculing Christian simplicity as foolishness, and many faithful are accustomed to turn it over in their hearts.” (S., p. 48) The question simply stated is this: “by what reason or necessity was God made man, and by his death, as we believe and confess, gave back life to the world, when he could have done this either through another person, either human or angelic, or through his will alone?” (S., p. 48)

In Chapter 3, Anselm’s interlocutor, his fellow monk and student Boso, raises several specific objections made by non-Christians to the Christian doctrine of the Incarnation: “we do injustice and show contempt [contumeliam] to God when we affirm that he descended into a woman’s womb, and that he was born of woman, that he grew nourished by milk and human food, and – so that I can pass over many other things that do not seem befitting to God– that he endured weariness, hunger, thirst, lashes, and the cross and death between thieves.” (S., v. 2, p. 51)

Anselm’s immediate response mirrors the structure of the Cur Deus Homo. Each of the points he makes are argued in fuller detail later in the work.

For it was fitting that, just as death entered into the human race by man’s disobedience, so should life be restored by man’s obedience. And, that, just as the sin that was the cause of our damnation had its beginning from woman, so the author of our justice and salvation should be born from woman. And, that the devil conquered man through persuading him to taste from the tree [ligni], should be conquered by man through the passion he endured on the tree [ligni]. (S., p. 51)

The first book (Chapters 1-25), produces a lengthy argument, involving a number of distinctions, discussions about the propriety of certain expressions and the entailments of willing certain things. Chapters 16-19 represent a lengthy digression involving questions about the number of angels who fell or rebelled against God, whether their number is to be made up of good humans, and related questions. The three most important parts of the argument take the form of these discussions: the justice and injustice of God, humans, and the devil; the entailments of the Father and the Son willing the redemption of humanity; the inability of humans to repay God for their sins.

Anselm distinguishes, as he does in the earlier treatise De Veritate, different ways in which an action or state can be just or unjust, specifically just and unjust at the same time, but not in the same way of looking at the matter. “For, it happens sometimes [contingit] that the same thing is just and unjust considered from different viewpoints [diversis considerationibus], and for this reason it is adjudged to be entirely just or entirely unjust by those who do not look at it carefully.” (S., p. 57) Humans are justly punished by God for sin, and they are justly tormented by the devil, but the devil unjustly torments humans, even though it is just for God to allow this to take place.“In this way, the devil is said to torment a man justly, because God justly permits this and the man justly suffers it. But, because a man is said to justly suffer, one does not mean that he justly suffers because of his own justice, but because he is punished by God’s just judgment.” (S., p. 57)

Not only distinguishing between different ways of looking at the same matter is needed, but also distinguishing between what is directly willed and what is entailed in willing certain things. On first glance, it could seem that God the Father directly wills the death of Jesus Christ, God the Son, or that the latter wills his own death. Indeed something like this has to be the case, because God does will the redemption of humanity, and this comes through the Incarnation and through Christ’s death and resurrection. According to Anselm, Christ dies as an entailment of what it is that God wills. “For, if we intend to do something, but propose to do something else first through which the other thing will be done, when what we chose to be first is done, if what we intend comes to be, it is correctly said to be done on account of the other…” (S., p. 62-3) Accordingly, what God willed (as both Father and Son) was the redemption of the human race, which required the death of Christ, and required this “not because the Father preferred the death of the Son over his life, but because the Father was not willing to restore the human race unless man did something as great as that death of Christ was.” (S., p. 63) As Anselm goes on to explain, the determination of the Son’s will then takes place within the structure of the Father’s will. “Since reason did not demand that another person do what he could not, for that reason the Son says that he wills his own death, which he preferred to suffer rather than that the human race not be saved.” (S., p. 63-4) What was involved in Christ’s death, therefore, was actually obedience on the part of the Son, following out precisely what was entailed by God’s willing to redeem humanity. The central point of the argument is then making clear why the redemption of humanity would have to involve the death of Christ. Articulating this, Anselm begins by discussing sin in terms of what is due or owed to (quod debet) God.

Sin is precisely not giving God what is due to him, namely: “[e]very willing [voluntas] of a rational creature should [debet] be subject to God’s will.” (S., p. 68) Doing this is justice or rightness of will, and is the “sole and complete debt of honor” (solus et totus honor), which is owed to God. Now, sin, understood as disobedience and contempt or dishonor, is not as simple, nor as simple to remedy, as it first appears. In the sinful act or volition, which already requires its own compensation, there is an added sin against God’s honor, which requires additional compensation. “But, so long as he does not pay for [solvit] what he has wrongly taken [rapuit], he remains in fault. Nor does it suffice simply to give back what was taken away, but for the contempt shown [pro contumelia illata] he ought to give back more than he took away.” (S., p. 68)

Anselm provides analogous examples: one endangering another’s safety ought to restore the safety, but also compensate for the anguish (illata doloris iniuria recompenset); violating somebody’s honor requires not only honoring the person again, but also making recompense in some other way; unjust gains should be recompensed not only by returning the unjust gain, but also by something that could not have otherwise been demanded.

The question then is whether it would be right for God to simply forgive humans sins out of mercy (misericordia), and the answer is that this would be unbefitting to God, precisely because it would contravene justice. It is really impossible, however, for humans to make recompense or satisfaction, that is to say, satisfy the demands of justice, for their sins. One reason for this is that one already owes whatever one would give God at any given moment. Boso suggests numerous possible recompenses: “[p]enitence, a contrite and humbled heart, abstinence and bodily labors of many kinds, and mercy in giving and forgiving, and obedience.” (S., p. 68)

Anselm responds, however: “When you give to God something that you owe him, even if you do not sin, you ought not reckon this as the debt that you own him for sin. For, you owe all of these things you mention to God.” (S., p. 68) Strict justice requires that a human being make satisfaction for sin, satisfaction that is humanly impossible. Absent this satisfaction, God forgiving the sin would violate strict justice, in the process contravening the supreme justice that is God. A human being is doubly bound by the guilt of sin, and is therefore “inexcusable” having “freely [sponte] obligated himself by that debt that he cannot pay off, and by his fault cast himself down into this impotency, so that neither can he pay back what he owed before sinning, namely not sinning, nor can he pay back what he owes because he sinned.” (S., p. 92)

Accordingly, humans must be redeemed through Jesus Christ, who is both man and God, the argument for which comes in Book II, starting in Chapter 6, and elaborated through the remainder of the treatise, which also treats subsidiary problems. The argument at its core is that only a human being can make recompense for human sin against God, but this being impossible for any human being, such recompense could only be made by God. This is only possible for Jesus Christ, the Son, who is both God and man, with (following the Chalcedonian doctrine) two natures united but distinct in the same person (Chapter7). The atonement is brought about by Christ’s death, which is of infinite value, greater than all created being (Chapter 14), and even redeems the sins of those who killed Christ (Chapter 15). Ultimately, in Anselm’s interpretation of the atonement, divine justice and divine mercy in the fullest senses are shown to be entirely compatible.

8. De Grammatico

This dialogue stands on its own in the Anselmian corpus, and focuses on untangling some puzzles about language, qualities, and substances. Anselm’s solutions to the puzzles involve making needed distinctions at proper points, and making explicit what particular expressions are meant to express. The dialogue ends with the puzzles resolved, but also with Anselm signaling the provisional status of the conclusions reached in the course of investigation. He cautions the student: “Since I know how much the dialecticians in our times dispute about the question you brought forth, I do not want you to stick to the points we made so that you would hold them obstinately if someone were to be able to destroy them by more powerful arguments and set up others.” (S., v. 1, p.168)

The student begins by asking whether “expert in grammar” (grammaticus) is a substance or a quality. The question, and the discussion, has a wider scope, however, since once that is known, “I will recognize what I ought to think about other things that are similarly spoken of through derivation [denominative].” (S., p.144)

There is a puzzle about the term “expert in grammar,” and other like terms, because a case, or rather an argument, can be made for either option, meaning it can be construed to be a substance or a quality. The student brings forth the argument.

That every expert in grammar is a man, and that every man is a substance, suffice to prove that expert in grammar is a substance. For, whatever the expert in grammar has that substance would follow from, he has only from the fact that he is a man. So, once it is conceded that he is a man, whatever follows from being a man follows from being an expert in grammar. (S., v. 1, p.144-5)

At the same time, philosophers who have dealt with the subject have maintained that it is a quality, and their authority is not to be lightly disregarded. So, there is a serious and genuine problem. The term must signify either a substance or a quality, and cannot do both. One option must be true and the other false, but since there are arguments to be made for either side, it is difficult to tell which one is false.

The teacher responds by pointing out that the options are not necessarily incompatible with each other. Before explaining how this can be so, he asks the student to lay out the objections against both options. The student begins by attacking the premise “expert in grammar is a man” (grammaticum esse hominem) with two arguments

No expert in grammar can be understood [intelligi] without reference to grammar, and every man can be understood without reference to grammar.Every expert in grammar admits of [being] more and less, and No man admits of [being] more or less From either one of these linkings [contextione] of two propositions one conclusion follows, i.e. no expert in grammar is a man. (S., p.146)

The teacher states, however, that this conclusion does not follow from the premises, and uses a similar argument to illustrate his point. The term “animal” signifies “animate substance capable of perception,” which can be understood without reference to rationality. The teacher then gets the student to admit to a further proposition, “every animal can be understood without reference to rationality, and no animal is from necessity rational,” to which he adds: “But no man can be understood without reference to rationality, and it is necessary that every man be rational.” (S., p.147) The implication, which the student sees and would like to avoid, is the clearly false conclusion, “no man is an animal.” On the other hand, the student does not want to give up the connection between man and rationality.

The teacher indicates a way out of the predicament by noting that the false conclusions are arrived at by inferring from the premises in a mechanical way, without examining what is in fact being expressed by the premises, without making proper distinctions based on what is being expressed, and without restating the premises as propositions more adequately expressing what the premises are supposed to assert. The teacher begins by asking the student to make explicit what the man, and the expert in grammar, are being understood as with or without reference to grammar. This allows the premises in the student’s arguments to be more adequately restated.

Every man can be understood as man without reference to grammar. No expert in grammar can be understood as expert in grammar without reference to grammar.No man is more or less man, and Every expert in grammar is more or less an expert in grammar. (S., v. 1, p.148-9)

In both cases, it is now apparent that where it seemed previously there was a common term, and therefore a valid syllogism, there is in fact no common term. This does not mean that nothing can be validly inferred from them. But, in order for something to be validly inferred, a common term must be found. The teacher advises: “The common term of a syllogism should be not so much in the expression brought forward [in prolatione] as in meaning [in sententia].” (S., p.149) The reasoning behind this is that what “binds the syllogism together” is the meaning of the terms used, not the mere words, “For just as nothing is accomplished if the term is common in language [in voce] but not in meaning [in sensu], likewise nothing impedes us if it is in our understanding [in intellectu] but not in the expression brought forward [in prolatione].” (S., p.149)

The first set of premises of the of the student’s double argument can be reformulated then as the following new premises.

To be a man does not require grammar, and
To be an expert in grammar requires grammar. (S., p.149)

Thus restated, the premises do have a common term, and a conclusion can be inferred from them namely: “To be an expert in grammar is not to be a man, i.e., there is not the same definition for both of them.” (S., p.149) What this conclusion means is not that an expert in grammar is not a man, but rather that they are not identical, they do not have the same definition. Other syllogisms, appearing at first glance valid but terminating in false conclusions, can similarly be transformed. One that deals directly with the student’s initial question runs:

Every expert in grammar is spoken of as a quality [in eo quod quale].
No man is spoken of as a quality.
Thus, no man is an expert in grammar. (S., p.150)

The premises can be reformulated according to their meaning:

Every expert in grammar is spoken of as expert in grammar as a quality.
No man is spoken of as man as a quality. (S., p.150)

It is now apparent that again there is no middle term, and the conclusion does not validly follow. The student explores various possible syllogisms that might be constructed before the teacher indicates that the student, who ends with the conclusion, “the essence of man is not the essence of expert in grammar,” (S., p.150) has not fully grasped the lesson. The teacher brings in a further distinction, that of respect or manner (modo). This requires attention to what is actually being signified by the expressions “man,” and “expert in grammar.” An expert in grammar, who is a man, can be understood as a man without reference to grammar, so in some respect an expert in grammar can be understood without reference to grammar (that is, understood as man, not as an expert in grammar, which he nonetheless still is). And, a man, who is an expert in grammar, who is to be understood as an expert in grammar, cannot be so understood without reference to grammar.

Another puzzle can be raised about man and expert in grammar, bearing on being present in a subject. An argument clearly going against Aristotle’s intentions can be derived by using one of his statements as a premise.

Expert in grammar is among those things that are in a subject.
And, no man is in a subject.
So, no expert in grammar is a man. (S., p.154)

The teacher again directs the student to pay close attention to the meaning of what is being said. When one speaks about an “expert in grammar,” the things that are signified are “man” and “grammar.” Man is a substance, and is not present in a subject, but grammar is a quality and is present in a subject. So, depending on what way one looks at it, someone can say that expert in grammar is a substance and is not in a subject, if they mean “expert in grammar” insofar as the expert in grammar is a man (secundum hominem). Alternately, one can say that expert in grammar is a quality and is in a subject, if they mean “expert in grammar” with respect to grammar (secundum grammaticam). Similarly, “expert in grammar” can be regarded, from different points of view, as being primary or secondary substance, or as neither.

“Expert in grammar” has been shown to be able to be both a substance and a quality, so that there is no inconsistency between them. The student then raises a related problem, asking why “man” cannot similarly be a substance and a quality. “For man signifies a substance along with all those differentia that are in man, such as sensibility and mortality.” (S., p.156) The teacher points out that the case of “man” is not similar to that of “expert in grammar.” “[Y]ou do not consider how dissimilarly the name ‘man’ signifies those things of which a man consists, and how expert in grammar [signifies] man and grammar. Truly, the name ‘man’ signifies by itself and as one thing those things of which the entire man consists.” (S., p.156)

“Expert in grammar,” however, signifies “man” and “grammar” in different ways. It signifies “grammar” by itself (per se); it signifies “man” by something else (per aliud). Expertise in grammar is an accident of man, so “expert in grammar” cannot signify “man” in any unconditioned sense, but rather is something said of man (appellative hominis). The man is the underlying substance in which there can be grammar, and the underlying substance can be expert in grammar.

So, “expert in grammar” can rightly be understood in accordance with Aristotle’s Categories as a quality, because it signifies a quality. At the same time, “expert in grammar” is said of a substance, that is to say, man. This still raises some problems in the mind of the student, who suggests “expert in grammar” could be a having, or under the category of having, and asks whether a single thing can be of several categories. The teacher, conceding that the issue requires further study, maintains, directing the student through several examples, that a single expression that signifies more than one thing can be in more than one category, provided the things that are signified are not signified as actually one thing.

9. The De Veritate

This dialogue, which Anselm describes in its preface as one of “three treatises pertaining to the study of Sacred Scripture,” dealing with “what truth is, in what things [quibus rebus] truth is customarily said to be, and what justice is” (S., v. 1, p. 173), begins with a student asking for a definition of truth. The dialogical lesson takes the truth of statements as a starting point. A statement is true “[w]hen what it states [quod enuntiat], whether in affirming or in negating, is so [est].” (S., v. 1, p. 177) Given this, Anselm’s theory of truth appears at first glance a simple correspondence theory, where truth consists in the correspondence between statements and states of affairs signified by those statements.

His theory is more complex, however, and relies on a Platonic notion of participation, or more accurately stated, weds together a correspondence theory with a Platonic participational view. “[N]othing is true except by participating in truth; and so the truth of the true thing is in the true thing itself. But truly the thing stated is not in the true statement. So, it [the thing stated] should not be called its truth, but the cause of its truth. For this reason it seems to me that the truth of the statement should be sought only in the language itself [ipsa oratione].” (S., v. 1, p. 177) It is very important at this point to keep in mind that Anselm is not saying that all truth is simply in language, but rather that the truth of statements, truth of signification, lies in the language used. The truth of the statement cannot be the statement itself, nor can it be the statement’s signifying, nor the statement’s “definition,” for in any of these cases, the statement would always be true. Instead, statements are true when they signify correctly or rightly, and Anselm provides the key term for his larger theory of truth, “rectitude” or “rightness.” “Therefore its [an affirmation’s] truth is not something different than rightness [rectitudo].” (S., p. 178)

Anselm notes, however, that even when a statement affirms that what-is-not is, or vice versa, there is stillsome truth or correctness to the statement. This is so because there are two kinds of truth in signifying, for a statement can signify that what is the case is the case, and it does signify what it signifies. “There is one rightness and truth of the statement because it signifies what it was made to signify [ad quod significandum facta est]; and, there is another, when it signifies that which it received the capacity to signify [quod accepit significare].” (S., p. 179)

Accordingly, for Anselm, the truth of statements consists in part in the correspondence of the statement to the state of affairs signified, but also in the signification itself, the sense or meaning of the statement. “It always possesses the latter kind of truth, but does not always possess the former. For, it has the latter kind naturally, but the former kind accidentally and according to usage.” (S., p.179) For example, the expression “it is day” always possesses the second kind of truth, since the expression can always signify what it does signify; in other words, it can convey a meaning. But, whether or not it possesses the first kind of truth depends on whether in fact it is day. According to Anselm, in certain statements, the two kinds of truth or correctness are inseparable from each other, examples of these being universal statements, such as “man is an animal.”

He goes on to discuss truth of other kinds, in thought, in the will, in action, in the senses, and in the being of things. Truth in thought is analogous to truth in signification, but Anselm discusses only the first kind of truth, where thoughts correspond to actual states of affairs, this being “rightness” of thought. Truth in the will likewise consists in rightness, in other words, willing what it is that one ought to will. With respect to actions, again truth is rightness, in this case goodness. “To do good [bene facere] and to do evil [male facere] are contraries. For this reason, if to do the truth [veritatem facere] and to do good are the same in opposition, they are not different in their signification. . . . [T]o do what is right [rectitudinem facere] is to do the truth… Nothing is more apparent then than that the truth of an action is its rightness.” (S., p. 182)

But Anselm distinguishes between natural actions, such as a fire heating, which are non-rational and necessary, and non-natural actions, such as giving alms, which are rational and non-necessary. The natural type is always true, like the second kind of truth in signification. The non-natural type is sometimes true, sometimes false, like the first kind of truth in signification. Truth of the senses, Anselm argues, is a misnomer, as the truth or falsity involving the senses is not in the senses but in the “judgment” (in opinione). “The inner sense itself makes an error [se fallit], rather than the exterior sense lying to it.” (S., p. 183)

Speaking of the second kind of truth in signification, and of the truth of natural actions involves reference to a “Supreme Truth,” namely, God. Everything that is, insofar as it is receives its being [quod est] from the Supreme Truth. An argument, placed in the mouth of the dialogue’s teacher, follows from this: 1) “If all things are this, i.e. what they are there [in the Supreme Truth], without a doubt they are what they ought to be.” 2) “But whatever is what it ought to be is rightly [recte est]. “Thus, everything that is, is rightly.” (S, p. 185)

This, however, seems to present a genuine and serious problem, given the existence and experience of evil, specifically, “many deeds done evilly” (multa opera male), in the world as we know it. In order to address this, Anselm resorts to the traditional distinction between God causing and God permitting evil. Evil actions and evil willing ought not to be, but what happens when God permits it, because He permits it, ought to be. The solution to this puzzle lies in further distinction. “For in many ways the same matter [eadem res] supports opposites when considered from different perspectives [diversis considerationibus]. This often happens to be the case for an action. . . .” (S., p. 187)

Anselm uses the example of a “beating” (percussio), which can be regarded both as an action, on the part of the agent, and as a passion, on the part of the passive sufferer. Both the active and the passive are necessarily connected. “For a beating is of the one acting and of the one suffering, whence it can be said of either the action [giving a beating] and the passion [getting a beating].” (S., p. 187) While these two are necessarily connected, the same is not true of the judgments that can be made regarding each side of the action, for instance the rightness of the action or the suffering. A person might be rightly beaten, but it may be wrong for this or that person to give the beating. The implication of this is that “it can happen that according to nature an action or a passion should be, but in respect to the person acting or the person suffering should not be, since neither should the former do it nor the latter suffer it.” (S., p. 188) In this case, and other similar cases, it is possible for the same thing to have seemingly contradictory determinations. The key here, however, is that the same thing is being “considered from different perspectives [diversis considerationibus]” (S., p. 188)

Anselm then brings all of the other kinds of truth back to the truth of signification, not reducing them all to signification, but rather indicating how they are connected to each other. “For, there is true or false signification not only in those things we are accustomed to call signs but also in all of the other things that we have spoken of. For, since something should not be done by someone unless it is something that someone should do, by the very fact that someone does something, he says and he signifies that he ought to do that thing.” (S., p. 189) In every action, according to this doctrine, there is an implicit assertion of truth being made (rightly or wrongly) by the agent. For example, an expert tells a non-expert that certain herbs are non-poisonous, but avoids eating them, his action’s (true) signification being more trustworthy than his (false) signification in his statement. This applies even further.

So likewise, if you did not know that one ought not to lie and somebody lied in your presence, then even if he were to tell you that he himself ought not to lie, he would himself tell you more by his deed [opere] that he ought to lie than by his words that he ought not [to lie]. Similarly, when somebody thinks of or wills something, if you did not know whether he ought to will or think of that thing, and if you could see his willing or his thought, he would signify to you by that very action [ipso opere] that he ought to think about and will that thing. And, if he did ought to do so, he would speak the truth. But if not, he would lie. (S., p. 189)

In Anselm’s parlance, it is possible for action, willing, and thinking to be false, in other words, to be lies on the part of the acting, willing, or thinking subject. This involves a reference, noted earlier, to the Supreme Truth, God, more specifically to the truth of the being of things as they are in the Supreme Truth. All of the types of truth or rightness are ultimately determined or conditioned by the Supreme Truth, which is “the cause of all other truths and rightnesses.” Some of these other truths are themselves in turn causes as well as effects, while others are simply effects. “Since the truth that is in the existence of things is an effect of the Supreme Truth, this is also the cause of the truth belonging to thoughts and the truth that is in propositions; but these two truths are not the cause of any truth.” (S., p. 189)

After having carried out these dialogic investigations of the various kinds of truth, Anselm is now ready to provide a definition: “Accordingly, unless I am mistaken, we can establish the definition that [definire quia] truth is rightness perceptible only to the mind.” (S., p. 191) This introduces the final discussion of the dialogue, the student asking: “But since you have taught me that all truth is rightness, and since rightness seems to me to be the same thing as justice, teach me also what I might understand justice to be.” (S., p. 191) The teacher’s first response is that justice, truth, and rightness are convertible with each other. “[W]hen we are speaking of rightness perceptible only to the mind, truth and rightness and justice are mutually defined in relation to each other [invicem sese definiunt].” (S., p. 192) This relationship allows the rational investigating human being to use one of these terms, or rather their understanding of the meaning of the terms, to arrive at understanding of the others (which is in fact what is going on in the dialogue itself) “[I]f somebody knows one of them and does not know the others, he can extend his knowledge [scientiam pertingere] though the known to the unknown. Verily, whoever knows one cannot not know the other two.” (S., p. 192)

Justice, however, has a sense more specific and appropriate to humans, “the justice to which praise is owed, just as to its contrary, namely injustice, condemnation is owed.” (S., p. 192) This sort of justice, Anselm argues, resides only in beings that know rightness, and therefore can will it. Accordingly, this kind of justice is present only in rational beings, and in human beings, it is not in knowledge or action but in the will. Justice is then defined as “rightness of will,” and as this could allow instances where one wills rightly, in other words what he or she ought to will, without wanting to be in such a situation, or instances where one does so want, but wills the right object for a bad motive, the definition of justice is further specified as “rightness of will kept for its own sake” (propter se servata). Anselm makes clear that this uprightness is received from God prior to the human being having it, willing it, or keeping it. And, it is in a certain way radically dependent on God’s own justice. “If we say that [God’s] uprightness is kept for its own sake, we do not seem to be able to suitably [conuenienter] speak likewise about any other rightness. For just as [God’s uprightness] itself and not some other thing, preserves itself, it is not through another but through itself, and likewise not on account of another thing but on account of itself.” (S., p. 196)

This leads to the final topic of the De Veritate, the unity of truth. According to Anselm, although there is a multiplicity of true things, and multiple and different ways for things to be truth, there is ultimately only one truth, prior to all of these, and in which they participate. From the discussions in earlier treatises, it is clear that this single and ultimate truth is, of course, God.

10. The De Libertate Arbitrii

This treatise is the second of the three treatises pertaining to the study of Sacred Scripture, and it deals primarily with the nature of the human will and its relation to the justice or rightness of will discussed at the end of the De Veritate. The student begins by asking the central questions:

Since free choice [liberum arbitrium] seems to be opposed to God’s grace, and predestination, and foreknowledge, I desire to know what this free choice is and whether we always have it. For if free choice is “to be able to sin and not sin,” just as it is customarily said by some people, and we always have it, in what way can we be in need of any grace? For if we do not always have it, why is sin imputed to us when we would sin without free choice. (S., v. 1, p. 207)

The immediate response is the denial that freedom of choice is or includes the ability to sin, for this would mean that God and the good angels, who cannot sin, would not have free choice. Anselm is unwilling even to entirely distinguish free choice of God and good angels from that of humans. “Although the free choice of humans differs from the free choice of God and the good angels, still the definition of this freedom, in accordance with this name, ought to be the same in either case.” (S., p. 208)

It appears at first that a will which can turn towards sinning or not sinning is more free, but this is to be able to lose what befits and what is useful or advantageous for (quod decet et quod expedit) the one willing. To be able to sin is actually an ability to become more unfree. Key to the argument is that not sinning is understood as a positive condition of maintaining uprightness or righteousness (rectitudo). Anselm makes two key points in support of this. “The will that cannot turn away from the righteousness of not sinning is thereby freer than one that can desert it [righteousness].” (S., p. 208) The analysis of the conceptions of freedom, sin, and power are similar to those in Proslogion Chapter 7: “The ability to sin, therefore, which when added to the will decreases its freedom and when taken away increases it, is neither freedom nor a part of freedom.” (S., v. 1, p. 209)

This raises two problems, however. Both the fallen angels and the first human were able to sin and did sin. Given the argument just made, being able to sin and freedom seem foreign (aliena) to each other, but if one does not sin from free choice, it seems one must sin of necessity. In addition, the notion of being a “servant of sin” requires clarification, specifically explaining how a free being can be mastered by sin, and thereby become a servant. Anselm makes a subtle distinction. In the case of the first man or the fallen angel, the Devil:

He sinned by his choice which was free, but not through that from which [unde] it was free, i.e. by the ability through which he was able to [per potestatem qua poterat] not sin and to not serve sin, but rather by the ability of sinning that he had [per potestatem quam habebat peccandi], by which he was neither aided toward the freedom of not sinning nor compelled to the service of sinning. (S., v. 1, p. 210)

Analogously to this, if somebody is able to be the servant of sin, this does not mean that sin is able to master him, so that his choice to sin, to become a servant of sin, is not free. Another question arises then, how a person, after becoming a servant of sin, would still be free, to which the answer is that one still retains some natural freedom of choice, but is unable to use one’s freedom of choice in exactly the same way as one could prior to choosing to sin. (Later in Chapter 12, Anselm clarifies that being a “servant of sin” is precisely “an inability to avoid sinning.”)

The difference, however, is all important. The freedom of choice which they originally possessed was oriented towards an end, that of “willing what they ought to will and what is advantageous for them to will,” (S., p. 211) in other words, uprightness or righteousness (rectitudo) of will. Anselm then considers four different possible ways in which they had this freedom oriented towards righteousness or uprightness of will:

  1. whether for acquiring it without anyone giving it, since they did not yet have it
  2. whether for receiving it when they did not yet have it, if someone were to give it to them so that they might have it
  3. whether for deserting what they received and for recovering by themselves what they had deserted
  4. whether for always keeping it once it was received (S., v. 1, p. 211)

The first three possibilities are rejected, leaving only the fourth. Rational creatures were originally given uprightness of will, which they were obliged to keep, but free (in one sense) to keep or lose. Freedom of choice, however, has a reason, namely, keeping this original uprightness-of-will for its own sake.

There are then two different possible states. So long as one keeps uprightness-of-will for its own sake, one does so freely. Once one loses uprightness-of-will through use of one’s free choice, one no longer has the ability to keep uprightness-of-will, really by definition, since one has after all lost it. Here, Anselm clarifies: “Even if uprightness of will is lacking, still [a] rational nature does not possess less than what belongs to it. For, as I view it, we have no ability that by itself suffices unto itself for its action; and still, when those things are lacking without which our abilities can hardly be brought to action, we still no less say that we have those abilities that are in us.” (S., p. 212-3)

He employs two analogies, one general, and one more specific. One can have an ability or an instrument that can accomplish something, but when the conditions for its employment are lacking, it cannot by itself bring anything about. Likewise, seeing a mountain requires not only sight, but also light and a mountain actually being there to be seen. When uprightness of will is lacking, having been lost, one still has theability to keep it, but the conditions for having and keeping it are lacking. “What prevents us from having the power of keeping uprightness of will for sake of that very uprightness, even if this very uprightness is absent, so long as within us there is reason, by which we are able to recognize it, and will, by which we are able to hold onto it? For the freedom of choice spoken of here consists in both of these [ex his enim constat].” (S., p. 214)

Chapters 5-9 discuss temptation, specifically how the will can be overcome by temptation, thereby turning away from or losing uprightness-of-will, by willing an action (for example, lying, murder, theft, adultery) contrary to God’s will. Anselm concedes that a person can be placed in a situation where options are constrained, and where unwelcome consequences follow from every option, for instance, when a person is constrained to choose between lying and thereby avoiding death (for a while), and dying. The will is stronger than any temptation, or even the Devil himself, but both temptation and the Devil can create difficulties for the resisting person, and can constrain the situations of choice. In these cases, the will can allow itself to be overcome. This still involves free choice of the will, but this is a free choice for one sort of unfreedom or another. Anselm argues that “a rational nature always possesses free choice, since it always possesses the ability of keeping uprightness of will for the sake of this rightness itself, even though with difficulty at some times.” (S., p. 222)

Once this uprightness has been lost, or rather abandoned freely, the free human being becomes a servant of sin because it cannot by itself regain that uprightness on its own. “Indeed, just as no will, before it possessed uprightness, was able to acquire it unless God gave it, so, after it deserted what it had received, it is not able to regain it unless God gives it back.” (S., p. 222) In such a condition, a human being remains free in the sense that they could keep uprightness-of-will, in other words, not sin, precisely by freely choosing to keep it, if they had it, which they do not. Once God gives it again, a human being is then once again free to keep it or to lose it. Freedom in the full sense for Anselm, therefore, consists in the ability to keep uprightness-of-will for its own sake, that is to say, choosing and acting in such a way as to keep oneself from losing it, even when faced with temptation.

11. The De Casu Diaboli

This dialogue, considerably longer than the preceding De Veritate and De Libertate, further develops certain themes they raised, and addresses several other philosophical issues of major importance, including the nature of evil and negation, and the complexities of the will. The dialogue begins in an attempt to understand the implications of all created beings having nothing that they have not received from God. “No creature has anything [aliud] from itself. For what does not even have itself from itself, in what way could it have anything from itself?” (S., v. 1, p. 233) Only God, the Creator, alone has anything (quidquid) from himself. All other beings, as dependent on God for their being, have what they have from him. The student raises an initial problem in Chapter 1, having to do with divine causation. It seems then that God is the cause not only of created beings having something, and for their being, but also that God is then the cause for their passing into non-being. This would then mean that God is the cause not only for whatever is, but also for whatever is not.

The teacher makes a needed distinction here. A thing is said to cause another thing to be in several different cases. One who actually causes something else to be is properly said to cause it. When one able to cause something not to be does not so cause it, and then the thing is (because the first thing does not interfere with the second thing being or coming to be), the first thing is improperly said to cause the second. Accordingly, God is said to cause things in both ways. God is also improperly said to cause what is not not to be, when what is actually meant by this is that God simply does not cause it to be. Likewise, when things pass from being to not-being, God does not cause this, even though he does not conserve them in being, because they simply return to their original state of non-being.

This has a bearing on the question of divine responsibility for evil, setting up the other problems of the dialogue.

Just as nothing that is not good comes from the Supreme Good, and every good is from the Supreme Good, likewise nothing that is not being [essentia] comes from the Supreme Being [essentia], and all being is from the Supreme Being. Since the Supreme Good is the Supreme Being, it follows that every being is a good thing and every good thing is a being. Therefore, just as nothing and non-being [non esse] are not being [essentia], likewise they are not good. So, nothing and non-being are not from He from whom nothing is unless it is good and being. (S., p. 235)

The central problem is that of understanding how the Devil could be responsible for his own sin, given that what he has he has from God, and the lengthy argumentation in Chapter 3 sets in clear light the problem’s complex nature. It seems that there is an inconsistency between God’s goodness and the justness of his judgment, on the one hand, and the Devil not receiving perseverance from God who did not give it to him, on the other hand. The student is making the global assumption, however, that since giving X is the cause of X being received, not giving X is the cause of X not being received.

In some cases this does not hold, however, and the teacher supplies an example. “If I offer [porrigo] you something, and you accept it [accipis], I do not therefore give it because you receive it [accipis], but you therefore receive it because I give it, and the giving is the cause of the receiving.” (S., p. 236) In that positive case, the giving is the cause of the receiving, but, if the case is made negative the order of causing what takes place (or rather what does not take place) is the opposite. “What if I offer that very thing to someone else and he does not accept it? Does he therefore not accept it because I do not give it?” The student realizes that the proper way of looking at matters is “rather that you do not give it because he does not accept it.” (S., p. 236) In cases like these, where not-giving X is not the cause of X not being received, if one does not give X, it can still be inferred that X is not received. This answer does not quell the student’s initial misgivings, however, for it simply pushes the fundamental problem back further. “If you wish to assert that God did not give to him because he did not receive, I ask: why did he not receive? Was it because he was not able to, or because he did not will to? For if he did not have the ability or the will to receive [potestatem aut uoluntatem accipiendi], God did not give it.” (S., p. 237) This seems to place the responsibility for the Devil’s lack back on God, and the student asks: “[I]f he was not able to have the ability or the will to receive perseverance unless God gives it, in what did he sin, by not accepting what God did not give him to be able or to will to receive [posse aut uelle accipere]?” (S., p. 237)

The answer is that God in fact did give this ability and will, and the student concludes that the Devil did receive perseverance from God. The teacher makes two important clarifications. The first is that “I did not say that God gave him the receiving of perseverance [accipere perseuerantiam], but rather to be able or to will to [posse aut uelle] receive perseverance.” (S., p. 237) The student then concludes that since the Devil willed to and was able to (voluit et potuit) receive perseverance, he did in fact receive it.

This leads to the second, much more involved clarification. There are cases where one is able to and wills to do something, but does not finish it or bring it about completely or perfectly, cases where one’s initial will is changed before the thing is entirely finished.

T: Then, you willed and you were able to persevere in what you did not persevere.
S: Certainly I willed to, but I did not persevere in willing [in voluntate], and so I did not persevere in the action.
T: Why did you not persevere in willing?
S: Because I did not will to.
T: But, so long as you willed to persevere in the action, you willed to persevere in that willing [in voluntate]? (S., p. 238)

The will is marked by a reflexivity, as the student recognizes when the teacher asks why he did not persevere in willing. One can answer that he did not persevere in willing (which is the reason he did not then continue to will) because he did not will to. This type of explanation could be iterated infinitely, and would not really explain anything thereby. Instead, the explanation for failure of will (defectus. . . uoluntatis) requires reference to something else, and this requires coining a new expression. As the teacher says: “Let us say. . . . that to persevere in willing is to ‘will completely’ [peruelle].”(S., p. 238) And, he asks his student: “When, therefore, you did not complete what you willed to and were able to, why did you not complete it?” In response, the student supplies the conclusion: “Because I did not will it completely.” (S., p. 238) This allows a partial resolution to the problem: even though the Devil received the will and the ability to receive perseverance and the will and the ability to persevere, he did not actually receive the perseverance because he did not will it completely. Again, this answer simply pushes the problem to yet another level, leading the student to ask:

Again I ask why he did not will completely. For when you say that what he willed he did not completely will, you are saying something like: What he willed at first, he did not will later. So, when he did not will what he willed before, why did he not will it unless because he did not have the will to? And by this latter I do not mean the will that he had previously when he willed it but the one that he did not have when he did not will it. But why did he not have this will, unless because he did not receive it? And, why did he not receive it, unless because God did not give it? (S., p. 239)

The teacher reminds the student of the point established earlier, that God did not give to the Devil because the Devil did not receive. Again the failure is on the side of the creature, and at this point, the teacher asserts that the Devil could have received keeping (tenere) what he had but instead abandoned or deserted it (deseruit). The relation between not-receiving and desertion has a parallel structure to not-giving and not-receiving: the Devil did not receive because he deserted, and God did not give to the Devilbecause the Devil did not receive.

Once again, this is only a partial solution, and it still seems that God could be responsible for the fall of the Devil, because God did not give something to the Devil, namely the will to keep, not to desert, what he had. The cause for someone deserting something, the student claims, is because that person does not will to keep it. The teacher’s response here is similar to the previous responses, since he distinguishes cases where the causal relation the student asserts to hold does not hold. It is dissimilar, however, and brings the complex argumentation of Chapter 3 to a close, because it introduces the key notion of conflicting objects of the will. Using the example of a miser who would will both to keep his money and to have bread, which requires him to spend money, the teacher notes that in this case, willing to desert is prior to not willing to keep some good, precisely because one wills to desert the thing in order to have something that one prefers to have. In the case of the Devil then:

the reason he did not will when he should have and what he should have was not that his will was deficient [defecit] because God failed [deo . . .deficiente] to give, but rather that the Devil himself, by willing what he should not have, expelled his good will because of an evil will arising. Accordingly, it was not because he did not have a good persevering will or he did not receive it, because God did not give it, but rather that God did not give it because the Devil, by willing what he should not have, deserted the good will, and by deserting it did not keep it. (S., p. 240)

In Chapters 4-28, issues raised by this solution to the problem are explored: the complex nature of the will, and the ontological status of evil, nothing, and injustice. Chapter 4 introduces a key distinction in objects of the will, between justice (justitia) and what is beneficial, useful, or agreeable (commodum). The case of the Devil is the case for rational, willing creatures generally. The teacher notes: “He could not have willed anything except for justice or what is beneficial. For, happiness, which all rational natures will, consists of beneficial things.” And, the student confirms this: “We can recognize this in ourselves, who will nothing except what we deem to be just or beneficial.” (S., p. 241)

The Devil went wrong by willing something beneficial, but which he did not have and was not supposed to have at the time he willed it; this was to will in a disordered manner (inordinate), and hereby to will the beneficial thing in such a way as to thereby not keep justice, precisely because willing the beneficial thing in a disordered way required abandoning justice. The Devil willed to be both like God and above God, by willing in such a way as to reject the order God introduced into things (including wills), or put in another way, using a term that somewhat resists translation: “he willed something by his very own will alone [propria voluntate], which was subject [subdita] to nobody. For it should be for God alone to so will something by his very own will alone, so that he does not follow a will superior [to his own].” (S., p. 242)

The will, in both angels and human beings, is complex, and can be regarded from different though complementary points of view, and in terms of its objects, which may differ or coincide. Chapters 12-14 discuss the relationships between the will, happiness, and justice. There are two fundamental kinds of good and two kinds of evil: justice (justitia) and what is beneficial, useful, or agreeable (commodum); injustice, and what is harmful or unpleasant (incommodum). Rational beings, as well as other beings that can perceive, have a natural will for avoiding what is harmful or unpleasant (incommodum) and for possessing what is beneficial, useful, or agreeable (commodum), and by this natural will, which is for happiness, they move themselves to willing other things, such as means by which to achieve the good they will.

In contrast, rational beings can be just or unjust, and can will justice or injustice. While all rational beings will happiness, not all of them will justice. It is possible for the two wills to conflict, and for one to will happiness inordinately, and in this way desert justice. Alternately, it is possible for one to will justice, which affects how happiness is willed.

Justice, when it is added, would so temper the will for happiness, that it would both curb the will’s excess and not cut off its ability of exceeding. So, because one would will to be happy, one could go to excess [excedere], but because one would will justly, one would not will to go to excess [excedere], and so having a just will for happiness one could and should be happy. And, by not willing what one ought not will, even though one could, one would merit being able to never will what should not be willed, and by always keeping justice through a restrained [moderatam] will, one would in no way be in need; but, if one were to desert justice through an unrestrained [immoderatam] will, one would be in need in every way. (S., p. 258)

Chapters 15-16 show that the relation between justice and injustice is one of a good and its privation, or put another way, justice is something, meaning it has goodness and it has being, while injustice is nothing but the absence or privation of the justice that should exist, namely in a will. The priority of justice over injustice means that the will retains traces (vestigia) of the justice it abandoned, namely that it ought to have justice. Injustice, or the state of being unjust, does not have any being, meaning it is nothing.

The relationships between evil, injustice, nothing, and the will are explained in Chapters 7-11, 19-20, and 26. First, as the teacher explains, the will itself, considered as will is not nothing. “Now, even if [the will, and the turning of the will] are not substances, still it cannot be proven that they are not beings [essentias], for there are many beings other than those which are properly called ‘substances.’ So then, a good will is not more something than an evil will is, nor is the latter more evil than the former is good.” (S., p. 245) The conclusion of this is not that the evil will is not in fact evil, but rather that “the evil will is not that very evil that makes evil people evil.” (S., p. 245)

The evil that makes people evil is instead injustice, the privation of justice, which is nothing. Saying that injustice and evil are in fact nothing raises a problem, however, for it does seem as if injustice and evil aresomething. For one, it seems that good and evil are both correlative to each other. “[E]vil is a privation of the good, I concede, but I see that good is no less the privation of evil. (S., p. 247) Posing a second difficulty, it seems that “evil” must signify something, since “evil” is a name. Lastly, the effects of evil seem in our experience to be something, so it seems paradoxical to insist that their cause is “nothing.”

These difficulties are resolved in several ways. First, as noted earlier, the relationship between evil or injustice as a privation, and its opposite, justice, is not a reciprocal one. Injustice is the privation of justice, justice is not the privation of injustice, but that which injustice is a privation of. Put another way, justice is something positive, and has being, and its being is not dependent upon or conditioned by its opposite and privation, injustice.

A second resolution lies in noting that “nothing” does signify, but signifies by negation. As the teacher says, making an important distinction:

“[E]vil” and “nothing” do signify something; still though what they signify is not evil or nothing. But, there is another way in which they signify something and what is signified is something; not truly something, though, but as-if something [quasi aliquid]. For indeed, many things are said in accordance with the form [of language] [secundum formam], which are not said in accordance with the reality [secundum rem]. (S., p. 250)So, in this way, “evil” and “nothing” signify something, and what is signified is something not in accordance with the reality but in accordance with the form of speaking. (S., p. 251)

A third resolution resides in explaining the relationship between the evil and nothing(ness) of injustice and the seeming positivity and being of things that get called evil. The will itself, as something, is good; in-itself, willing objects of the will, from the basest pleasures to being-like God, is good. Even the base and unclean useful or pleasurable things that irrational animals take pleasure in (commoda infima et immunda quibusirrationalia animalia delectanturS., p. 257) are in themselves good. What allows some positive existing thing to be an evil is the disorder it is involved in, and this has to do with the will, and with injustice as such, which are the source of any positivity evil has. “[S]ince no thing is called “evil” except for an evil will or on account of an evil will – like an evil man and an evil action – nothing is clearer than that no thing is evil, nor is evil anything but the absence of the justice that has been deserted in the will, or in some thing because of an evil will.” (S., p. 264)The absence of justice in the will, or injustice, is always strictly speaking nothing, the absence or lack of what ought to be. However, “sometimes the evil that is harmful or unpleasant (incommodum) is clearly nothing, like blindness, other times it is something, like sadness or pain.” (S., p. 274) What we typically focus on in thinking about evil are the latter cases. “When, then, we hear the word ‘evil,’ we do not fear the evil that is nothing, but the evil that is something, which follows from the absence of the good. For, from injustice and blindness, which are evil and which are nothing, follow many harmful or unpleasant things (incommoda) that are evil and are something, and these are what we dread when we hear the word ‘evil.’” (S., p. 274)

Accordingly, returning to the original issue, what creatures have that is good, they have from God, and what they have of evil derives from them (or from other creatures), but ultimately from nothing, that is to say, from a lack of what ought to be (or of what ought to have been). In any given case, of course, for instance the Devil’s case, it may take considerable analysis to see how what God gave permitted evil to take place.

12. The De Concordia

This late work is of particular interest for several reasons. In its content, it deals with matters examined by Anselm’s previous works, developing his doctrines further. The De Concordia refers to earlier works by name, specifically De Veritate, De Libertate Arbitrii, De Casu Diaboli, and De Conceptu Virginali et de Originali Peccato. Stylistically, its form is intermediary between those of the treatises and those of the dialogues, for Anselm addresses the possible objections and responses of an interlocutor in the first book, but does so within one continuous discourse. By the second and third books, Anselm no longer addresses an interlocutor. The three main topics or “questions” of the title unevenly divide the books of the work.

The first question, or problem, is how free choice (liberum arbitrium) and God’s foreknowledge could be compatible. This is really a clash between freedom and necessity. “[I]t is necessary [necesse est] that those things that God foreknows be going to happen [esse futura], and those that come to be through free choice do not arrive through any necessity.” (S., v. 2, p. 245) Anselm’s procedure is to assume both free choice and God’s foreknowledge in order to see whether they do in fact contradict each other, reasoning that, if they are genuinely incompatible, some other impossibility will arise from them. The assumption does not in fact generate a contradiction.

[I]f something is going to happen without necessity [sine necessitate], God, who foreknows all future things foreknows this very thing. So, what God foreknows necessarily [necessitate] is going to happen, just as it is foreknown. Accordingly, it is necessary [necesse est] for something to be going to happen without necessity. Therefore, for one who rightly understands this, the foreknowledge upon which necessity follows and the free choice from which necessity is removed do not seem contradictory at all, since it is necessary that God foreknows what is going to happen, and God foreknows something to be going to happen without any necessity. (S., p. 245)

The interlocutor raises several objections. The first is easily resolved, since it consists in simply shifting the ground from actions in general to sinning. Since God foreknows whether a person will sin or not, it seems that it is then necessary that a person sins or does not sin. Anselm simply makes explicit the full significance of what is being asserted, after which it is clear that framing the issue in terms of sin simply generates the same structure. “You should not say just: ‘God foreknows that I am going to sin or I am not going to sin,’ but rather: ‘God foreknows that without necessity I am going to sin or I am not going to sin.’” (S., p. 246)

The second objection raises a puzzle that stems from the sense of “necessity.” “Necessity seems to mean [sonare] compulsion or restraint [coactionem uel prohibitionem]. So, if it is necessary that I sin from my willing, I understand myself to be compelled by some hidden force to the will to sin; and if I do not sin, I am restrained from the will to sin.” (S., p. 246-7) In response, Anselm notes that some things are said to necessarily be or not be, even when there is no compulsion or restraint. In the case of voluntary actions, God foreknows them, but this foreknowledge does not produce any compulsion or restraint. To the contrary, God foreknows them precisely as voluntary actions. There is a necessity involved, but one that “follows,” rather than “precedes,” or determines, the thing or event.

Anselm provides examples of these two modalities of necessity. An uprising that is going to take place tomorrow does not occur by necessity. It could happen otherwise, although it will not. The sun rising tomorrow will happen by necessity. It must happen that way.

The uprising, which will not be from necessity, is asserted to be going to happen only by a following necessity [sequenti necessitate], since what is going to happen is being said of what is going to happen. For, if it is going to happen tomorrow, by necessity it is going to happen. The sunrise, however, is understood to be going to happen by both kinds of necessity, namely the preceding [praecedenti] necessity that makes the thing be – so it will be, since it is necessary [necesse est] that it be – and the following necessity that does not compel it to be. (S., p. 250)

When one says that it is necessary for what God foreknows to happen, care is needed lest these different modalities of necessity get mixed up. In the case of human willing, the necessity is of the following, not the preceding kind. There is a temporality involved in the necessity of human will.

What the free will wills, the free will can and cannot not-will [non velle], and it is necessary that it will. For, it can not-will before it wills, since it is free, and once it wills, it cannot not-will, but rather it is necessary that it will, since it is impossible for it to will and not will the same thing at the same time. . . . there is a twofold necessity, because [what the will freely wills] is compelled to be by the will, and what happens cannot at the same time not happen. But the free will makes these necessities, which can avoid them [coming to be] before they are. (S., p. 251)

Far from free will being incompatible with necessity and with God’s foreknowledge, free will is in fact productive of some necessity. Anselm employs a line of reasoning similar to that used in earlier works, most notably in the De Veritate. “Why then is it something astonishing if in this way something is from freedom and from necessity, when there are many things that are grasped in opposite ways by changing the point of view [diverse ratione]?” (S., p. 253) Employing this technique of distinction allows him the conclude that they are in fact compatible: “No inconsistency arises if, in accordance with the reasons given earlier, we assert one and the same thing to be necessarily going to be, since it is going to be, and that it is by no necessity compelled to be going to be, unless by that necessity that was said earlier to come to be from free will.” (S., p. 253)

In Chapter 5, ultimately in order to be able to provide a hermeneutic for seemingly problematic Scriptural passages, Anselm provides readers with an intellectual glimpse of eternity. Within eternity, there is no past or future, but only present; not the fleeting present of our temporal experience, but an eternal present, one that has an ontological priority over time as we experience it. “Although nothing is there except what is present, it is not the temporal present, like ours, but rather the eternal, within which all times altogether are contained. If in a certain way the present time contains every place and all the things that are in any place, likewise, every time is encompassed [clauditur] in the eternal present, and everything that is in any time.” (S., p. 254)

The nature of temporal things is that, insofar as they are in time, they do not always exist, and they change from time to time, whereas, as they exist in eternity, they always exist and are unchangeable. Anselm again frames this in terms of different points of view. Something can be able to be changed in time and still be unchangeable in eternity “For things that are changeable in time and unchangeable in eternity are not more opposed than not being in some time is to always being in eternity, or having been or going to be in accordance with time and not having been or not going to be in eternity.” (S., p. 255) This allows a fuller understanding of the relation between God’s foreknowledge and free choice. Before (in the temporal sequence) something is willed by a being existing in time, such as sinning or not sinning, it can be otherwise. It already exists in eternity, however, which is how God knows (or from our point of view, foreknows) it.

Anselm deals briefly with the second question or problem, reconciling predestination with free choice. This question seems to present a more problematic issue than divine foreknowledge. One can, as Anselm does, reconcile divine foreknowledge with free human choices by taking the position that God knows the free human choices as free, but from a vantage point of eternity, in which the free, uncompelled or restrained human actions have already happened, or more properly expressed are already happening. Predestination, however, seems to involve God making things happen the way they do. There is a possible resolution, however; we can say: “God predestines evil people and their evil works when he does not correct them and their evil works. But he is said to foreknow and predestine good things, because he causes [facit] that they be and that they be good; but for evil things, he only causes them to be what they are essentially, not that they are evil.” (S., p. 261) That is, (in accordance with the positions developed in Anselm’s earlier works), God never directly causes something evil, but rather provides the basis, in being and goodness, for what is then turned to evil, turned away from how it ought to be.

God does predestine human actions, according to Anselm, but he predestines them precisely as free or voluntary actions, which does not impose a necessity upon them that does not come from the choosing person’s willing, by the sort of following necessity discussed in relation to foreknowledge.

For God – even though He predestines – does not cause [facit] these things by compelling or restraining the will, but rather by committing [dimittendo] it to its own power. But even though the will uses its own power, it does nothing that God does not do in good things by his grace, in bad things not by fault of his own will but the will of the person. . . And just as foreknowledge, which does not err, only foreknows what is true, just as it will be, whether it is necessary or spontaneous, likewise, predestination . . . predestines a thing only as it is in foreknowledge. (S., p. 261)

The third question or problem is reconciling God’s grace and human free choice. In the course of showing that there is no real contradiction between these, Anselm’s treatment ranges over a number of issues. There are a variety of different viewpoints to be considered. Some, supporting themselves by appeal to Scripture, maintain that only divine grace leads to salvation; others, likewise appealing to other Scriptural passages, maintain that salvation depends on our will. Furthering the first position, some cite passages that seem to have good works and salvation depend on grace, and others point to the common enough experience of people who, despite their efforts, fail. In addition to Scriptural passages that teach that humans have free choice, or that urge people to do good and that condemn evil, there is a line of reasoning supporting free choice, namely: “If nobody were to do good or evil through free choice, then there would be no reason why [nec ullo modo esset cur] God justly gives what they deserve [retribueret] to good people and bad people on account of the merits of each one.” (S., p. 264)

The position that Anselm develops can be summarized as the following: Grace and free choice are not only compatible, but they in fact cooperate with each other. So, setting aside the exception of baptized infants, grace and free choice are both required for one to be saved. The ways in which grace and free choice cooperate with each other, as well as the ways in which free choice fails to cooperate with grace, are complex. Four main features of this are: the relationship between uprightness or righteousness (rectitudo) and grace; the need for cooperation with grace through one’s will; Anselm’s threefold distinction about the will; and the will for happiness and the will for justice.

Uprightness of will was discussed at length in Anselm’s earlier works, but it receives a more sophisticated and nuanced treatment in the De Concordia. As before: “There is no doubt that the will only wills rightly [recte] when it is upright [recta]. . . the will is not upright because it wills rightly, but it wills rightly because it is upright.” (S., p. 265-6) When the will wills uprightness for its own sake, it quite clearly wills rightly, and as in the earlier works, the will thereby wills to remain in this uprightness. In the De Concordia treatment, however, it is possible for one to will more uprightness. “I do not deny that an upright will wills an uprightness it does not yet have, when it wills to have a greater uprightness than it has; but I say that no will can will uprightness, if it does not have the uprightness by which it wills it.” (S., p. 266)

Later, Anselm says something very similar:

It is said to those already converted [i.e. turned towards God, conservis]: “be converted,” either so that they are further converted or so that they keep themselves converted. For, those who say: “convert us, God,” are already in some way converted, since they have an upright will when they will to be converted. But they pray through what they have received so that their conversion be augmented, just like those who were believers and said: “increase our faith.” It is as if both of these groups said: “increase in us what you gave us, bring to fruition [perfice] what you began. (S., p. 272)

When one has uprightness, one can will to preserve it, but lacking it, one cannot simply will oneself to have it, and then thereby have it. In addition, a creature cannot have uprightness from itself, nor can it have it from another creature. Instead, it can only have it through God’s grace.

Grace, as Anselm states clearly, is not something simple to pin down. For one, there are many different ways in which grace is bestowed. As Anselm says, he is “not up to the task [non. . .valeam] – for it does this in many ways – of enumerating the ways in which, after this uprightness has been received, grace aids free choice to keep what it received.” (S., p. 267) For another, graces follow on graces, and this takes place in more than one way as well. For instance: “If the will, by free choice keeping what it received, merits either an augmentation of the justice it has received, or even the power for a good will, or some sort of reward, all of these are fruits of the first grace, and “grace for grace,” and therefore all of this is to be imputed to grace. . .” (S., p. 266-7)

Free choice can cooperate with grace, grace that is first given, that is to say, the giving of the uprightness that the will receives by free choice, and then, in keeping this righteousness, cooperates with grace again. The grace can only be lost by the choices made to abandon uprightness in favor of something else. Worthy of note, in this treatise, Anselm gives a concrete example of this sort of grace. “This uprightness is never separated from the will except when it wills something else that is not in harmony with this uprightness. Just as when somebody receives the uprightness of willing sobriety, and they reject it by wiling an immoderate pleasure of drinking. (S., p. 267)

In Anselm’s view, graces are offered in many ways, even at the moments when one is deciding. He give several examples of how grace assists the free choice of the will when one is tempted to abandon the uprightness one has received, “by mitigating or even entirely cancelling the force of the besieging temptation, or by augmenting the affection of that same uprightness.” (S., p. 268) Anselm supplies a principle of interpretation in these matters: “In short, since everything is subject to God’s ordination, whatever happens to a person that aids the free choice to receiving or keeping that uprightness of which I speak, is to be imputed entirely to grace.” (S., p. 268)

In his explanation of the extended metaphor of cultivation in Book 3, Chapter 6, Anselm provides further examples of grace, showing grace coming from grace and the involvement of free choice at each point. The metaphor is:

[J]ust as the earth, without any cultivation by humans, brings forth innumerable herbs and trees without which human nature is nourished or by which it is even destroyed, those that most necessary to us for nourishing life [are not brought forth] without great labor and cultivation, and not without seeds. Likewise the human hearth, without teaching, without application [studio] spontaneously germinates thoughts and willings [voluntates] that are of no use for salvation or are even harmful, whereas those, without which we make no progress to salvation of the soul, never conceive and germinate without a seed of their own sort and laborious cultivation. (S., p. 270)

Grace, the seed, involves, even requires human participation and effort, and at the same time aids the human effort at nearly every turn. Grace and human willing constantly interact.

That [preachers] are sent, is a grace. And for this reason, preaching is a grace, since what comes down from grace is grace; and hearing [the Word preached] is grace, and understanding what is heard is grace, and uprightness of wiling is grace. Truly sending, preaching, hearing, understanding are nothing unless the will wills what the mind understands. . . So, what the mind conceives from hearing the Word is the seed of preaching and uprightness is the “growth” [incrementum] that God gives, without which “neither he who plants nor he who waters is anything, but rather God who gives the growth.” (S., p. 271)

Anselm’s discussion of the will in the De Concordia revisits some of the same doctrines developed in earlier works. A person is not forced by temptation or oppression to abandon uprightness of will, but rather fails to will to keep it because he or she wills something else. What a person wills, they either will on account of uprightness or some benefit. These motives can, and in some cases do, clash with each other. There is a finer analysis of the will, one used later as the starting point in the De Moribus attributed to Anselm.

Since particular instruments have what they are [hoc quod sunt], and their aptitudes, and their uses, let us distinguish in the will that on account of which we call it an instrument, its aptitudes, and its uses. These aptitudes in the will we can call “affections,” since the instrument of willing is affected by its aptitudes.The will is spoken of equivocally, and in three ways. For, the instrument of willing is one thing, the affection of the instrument is another, and the use of this same instrument is yet another. The instrument of willing is that power [vis] of the soul that it uses for willing . . . The affection of this instrument is that by which this instrument itself is affected to willing something even when it does not think about what it wills . . . . The use of this very instrument is what we have only when we think about the thing that we will. (S., p. 280)

There is only one instrument of willing, and the instrument itself does not admit of degrees. There are many uses of the will, that is, actual willings in concrete situations, using the instrument of the will. There are multiple affections or aptitudes of the will, and they do admit of greater and lesser degrees. Anselm states that all of these can be regarded as different wills, since they are not identical (they are distinguishable without being separable). The distinction also allows clarification of the agency of the will: “The will as instrument moves all of the other instruments that we freely [sponte] use, both those that are part of us – like hand, tongue, sight – and those external to us – like pen, hatchet – and causes [facit] all of our voluntary motions. Indeed, it moves itself through its own affection, whence it can be called an instrument that moves its very self.” (S., p. 283-4)

Two affections are of particular importance, and allow clarification of how one deserts justice or uprightness of will. “From these two affections, which we still call ‘wills,’ all the merit of a person comes, whether good or bad. These two wills differ, however, because the one which is to willing benefit is inseparable, but the one for willing uprightness is separable.” (S., p. 284) This means that the will to benefit, which Anselm also calls “will to happiness” (uoluntas beatitudinis) is always part of the human being, whereas the will to justice is not. A person can will justice or uprightness (if they have it), in which case they do have it, or a person can not. It is by deserting justice, or by not willing the will to justice, in order to will something else, meaning happiness of such a sort that it is incompatible with justice, that the will as a whole, and a person as a whole goes astray. This then happens by the use of the person’s free choice.

13. The Fragments

Anselm left behind fragments of an unfinished work that is of some philosophical interest. Stylistically, they appear to have been intended to be a full dialogue, and the portions that we possess are written in polished Latin style. Their content consists in analyses of concepts and terminology central to certain parts of Anselm’s work, and although the theme of uncritical acceptance of ordinary linguistic usage obscuring the real matters at hand is not a new one, the analyses are carried out to a degree of sophistication unparalleled by the extant works. The student begins the dialogue: “There are many matters regarding which I have for some time wished your response, among which are ability [potestas] and inability [impotentia], possibility and impossibility, necessity and freedom. I enumerate all of these together at the same time, because the knowledge of them seems to me to be mixed up together.” (u.W, p. 23)

The student is led to several absurd conclusions in reasoning about these matters, which Anselm treated in earlier works, for example reconciling God being omnipotent with God being unable to do certain things, or it being impossible for God to do those things. The teacher indicates that what is needed is an understanding of the meaning of the verb “to do” (facere), and of what is, properly speaking (proprie) “one’s own” (suum alicuius). “To do” (later, Anselm will indicate that agere, “to act” does this as well) has an interesting and unique status, since it is used colloquially as substitute for many other expressions, even including those involving “not doing” (non facere). The expressions which it may substitute for can be the proper responses to the question: “what is he/she doing?”

The teacher then introduces several discussions about causes. “[E]verything of which any verb is said [i.e. any subject of which a verb is predicated], is some cause for what is signified by that verb being the case. And, every cause, in ordinary linguistic usage [usu loquendi] is said to “make” or do” [facere] what it is the cause of.” (u.W, p. 26) Some of these are straightforward, such as a person running causes that there is running. Some of these are not quite so straightforward. “For, in this way, one who sits, makes there to be sitting, and one who suffers, makes there to be suffering, because if the one who suffers were not to be, there would not be a suffering.” (u.W, p. 26) In addition, the being or nature of a thing is a cause for what can be said of it. “If, for example, we say: ‘(a) human being is an animal,’ (a) human being is a cause that there be an animal and that it be said that ‘there is animal.’ I do not mean that (a) human being is the cause for animal existing, but rather that (a) human being is the cause that it be and be called (an) animal. For by this name the entire human being is signified and conceived, in which whole animal is as a part.” (u.W, p. 27-8)

Next, the teacher notes that there are different ways (modis usus loquendi) of using the verb “to do,” “to make,” or “to cause” (facere), and although he concedes that their division is numerous and quite complicated (multiplex et nimis implicata), he advances a sixfold division of causing things to be or not to be.

Two ways, when:

  1. it causes what it is said to cause, or
  2. it does not cause what it is said to cause not to be

Four ways, when it causes or does not cause something else to be or not to be. For we say something to cause another thing to be, because. . . .

  1. it causes something else to be, or
  2. it does not cause something else to be, or
  3. because it causes something else not to be, or
  4. because it does not cause something else not to be. (u.W, p. 29)

He provides examples of each of these:

  1. . . . when somebody is said to cause another person to be dead by slaying him or her with a sword.
  2. The only example . . . I have is if I posit someone who could resuscitate a dead person, but does not will to do so. . . . In other matters, examples are abundant, as when we say that somebody causes an evil to be, one that, when he or she is able to, that somebody does not cause it not to be.
  3. . . . when it is asserted that someone killed another . . . because he or she ordered that the other be killed, or because he or she caused the killer to have a sword, or because he or she accused the one who was killed . . . . These people do not cause per se what is said to be caused . . . .but by doing something else . . . they act through an intermediary.
  4. . . .when we pronounce someone to have killed another, who did not provide arms to the one who was killed before he or she was killed, or who did not retrain the killer, or who did not do something that, had he or she done it, the person would not have been killed
  5. . . . by taking away the arms, one causes the one who is about to be killed to be disarmed, or by opening a door one causes the killer not to be closed up where he or she had been detained
  6. . . . when by not disarming the killer, one does not cause them not to be armed, or by not leading the one who would be killed away, so that they would not be in the killer’s presence. (u.W, p. 29-30)

The same six modes also hold for “to cause not to be” (facere non esse), and Anselm provides examples for them as well. In all but the first mode, the one who is supposed to cause something does not cause it directly. Likewise, the modes hold for “not to cause to be” (non facere esse) and “not to cause not to be” (non facere non esse). These tools for analysis, the teacher suggests, can be used for other verbs, for “is” (esse), and for “ought” or “owes” (debere), allowing restatement of the expressions in forms better signifying what is really meant by the expressions.

Willing, or “to will” (velle) presents an interesting set of conditions, for it parallels “to do” or “to cause.” “We say ‘to will’ in the same six modes as ‘to cause to be.’ Likewise, we say ‘to will not to be’ in all of the different ways as ‘to cause not to be.’” (u.W, p. 37) This expression can also be dealt with under a fourfold division. In the first, “efficient will” (efficiens), “we will in such a way that [ut], if we are able to, we cause to be what we will.” (u.W, p. 38) In another type of willing, “approving will” (approbans), “[w]e will something that we are able to cause to be but we do not cause to be, but still, if it happens, it pleases us, and we approve of it.” (u.W, p. 38) In yet another type of willing, “conceding will” (concedens), “we will something. . . like a creditor who, being indulgent, wills to accept from a debtor barley in place of the wheat [the debtor owes].” (u.W, p. 38) In the last kind, “someone is said to will what one neither approves nor concedes, but rather permits, when one could prohibit it.” (u.W, p. 38)

There is an order of implication to these wills as well:

[T]he one that I have called “efficient will,” when it wills, so far as it is able, it causes it, and it also approves it, concedes it, and permits it. The “approving” will does not cause what it wills, but it does approve it, concede it, and permit it. The “conceding” will does not cause or approve what it wills, unless on account of something else, but it does concede and permit it. The “permitting” will does not cause, or approve, or concede what it wills, but only permits it even though it disapproves of it. (u.W, p. 38-9)

These categories of analysis can be extended not simply to human willing, but also to the divine will, addressing some of the issues about the divine will and its compatibility with evil human or angelic acts raised and dealt with in the earlier works.

Anselm also provides further classification of causes. Some causes are efficient causes, for instance the maker of an object, or the wisdom that makes somebody wise. Other causes are not efficient causes, including the matter from which something is made, or space and time, within which spatial and temporal things (localia et temporalia) come to be. All of these are causes in some sense, since they all have some role in what is, or is not, being so.

Anselm also distinguishes between proximate, or immediate causes and distant, or mediated causes. “Proximate causes are those that by themselves (per se) cause what they are said to cause, with no other mediate cause standing in between them and the effect that they cause, and distant [longinquae] causes are those that do not by themselves (per se) cause what they are said to cause, unless there is either one or more other mediating cause(s).” (u.W, p. 40) The first two modes of “to cause” discussed earlier apply to proximate causes, the other four to distant causes. Both efficient causes and non-efficient causes can be proximate or distant causes, although, as Anselm points out, strictly speaking, distant causes are themselves proximate causes of something at least: “Although very often causes are said to causes not by themselves (per se), but by another (per aliud), i.e. by a medium – whence they can be called distant causes – still every cause has its proximate effect that it causes by itself (per se) and whose proximate cause it is.” (u.W, p. 41) All causes are involved in a linking or network of causes and effects whose ultimate origin is God. “Every cause has causes going back all the way to the supreme cause of all, God, who since He is the cause of everything that is something, does not himself have a cause. Every effect whatsoever has many causes of diverse types, except for the first effect, since the supreme cause alone created everything.” (u.W, p. 41)

Anselm also discusses the meaning of “something” (aliquid) and “ability” (potestas) in the fragments, largely reiterating points made in earlier works.

14. Other Writings

Anselm produced other works beyond those summarized and excerpted from here, including theEpistola de Incarnatione Verbi (on the Incarnation of the Word), De Conceptu Virginali et de Originali Peccato (on the Virgin Conception and Original Sin), De Processione Spiritus Sancti (on the Procession of the Holy Spirit), all of which contain some philosophical reasoning as well as theological.

The last century has seen several other Anselmian texts made available to scholars. As noted earlier, theFragments come from an unfinished work edited and established by Dom F .S. Schmitt, O.S.B. Arguably of greater significance is the De Moribus (on Human Morals), edited and established by R. W. Southern and Dom Schmitt in Memorials of St. Anselm, which discusses the affections of the will at great length, in great detail, and through the use of many illuminating metaphors (similtudines). As Southern and Dom Schmitt note, this work was added to considerably and edited by an unknown redactor, then circulated and attributed to Anselm as the De Simultudinibus. Also included in that volume are the Dicta Anselmi (Anselm’s Sayings), assembled and redacted most likely by Anselm’s companion, the monk Alexander.

In addition, Anselm left behind numerous letters, prayers, and meditations, many of very high literary and spiritual quality.

15. References and Further Readings

Several readily accessible research bibliographies on Anselm exist. Two particularly useful ones are:

  • Kienzler, Klaus. International Bibliography: Anselm of Canterbury (Lewiston, New York: Edwin Mellen Press. 1999)
  • Miethe, T.L. “The Ontological Argument: A Research Bibliography,” The Modern Schoolman v. 54 (1977)

a. Primary Sources

The standard scholarly version of Anselm’s collected works is the edition by Dom F. S. Schmitt, O.S.B.S. Anselmi Cantuariensis Archiepiscopi Opera Omnia. 6 vols. (Edinburgh: Thomas Nelson and Sons. 1940-1961). It was reprinted in 1968 by F. Fromann Verlag (Stuttgart-Bad Cannstatt), and is available currently on CD-ROM from Past Masters.

Additional Latin writings may be found in Memorials of St. Anselm. R. W. Southern and F. S. Schmitt, O.S.B. eds. (Oxford University Press. 1969), and in Ein neues unvollendetes Werk des heilige Anselem von Canterbury, F. S. Schmitt, O.S.B., ed. (Munster: Aschendorf. 1936)

There are numerous English translations of Anselm’s works. Below are several of the most common:

  • St. Anselm’s Proslogion. Trans. M.J. Charlesworth. (Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press, 1965)
  • Anselm of Canterbury: The Major Works. Trans. Brian Davies and Gillian Evans (New York: Oxford University Press, 1998)
  • St. Anselm: Basic Writings. Trans. S. N. Deane (La Salle, Illinois: Open Court Press, 1962)
  • The Letters of Saint Anselm of Canterbury. 3 vols. Trans. Walter Frohlich. (Kalamazoo, Michigan: Cistercian Publications. 1990-1994)
  • Truth, Freedom, and Evil: Three Philosophical Dialogues. Trans. Jasper Hopkins and Herbert Richardson (New York. 1967)
  • Anselm of Canterbury. Trans. Jasper Hopkins and Herbert Richardson (Toronto: Edwin Mellen. 1976). Includes, as v. 4, Jasper Hopkin’s Hermeneutical and Textual Problems in the Complete Treatises of St. Anselm.
  • A New Interpretive Translation of St. Anselm's Monologion and Proslogion. Trans. Jasper Hopkins (Minneapolis: Arthur J. Banning. 1980)
  • The Prayers and Meditations of Saint Anselm. Trans. Benedicta Ward (New York: Penguin Books. 1973)
  • Anselm: Monologion and Proslogion. Trans. Thomas Williams. (Indianapolis: Hackett. 1995)
  • Anselm: Three Philosophical Dialogues. Trans. Thomas Williams. (Indianapolis: Hackett. 2002)


b. Secondary Sources

In addition to the works referenced below, the entirety of the occasional volumes comprising Analecta AnselmianaSpicilegium Beccense, and Anselm Studies are all to be highly recommended, as is The Saint Anselm Journal, which is online and affiliated with the Institute for Saint Anselm Studies.

  • Adams, Marilyn McCord. “Fides Quaerens Intellectum: St. Anselm’s Method In Philosophical Theology,” Faith and Philosophy, vol. 9, n. 4 (1992)
  • Barth, Karl. Anselm: Fides Quaerens Intellectum. Trans. Ian Robertson (Richmond: John Knox Press. 1960)
  • Baumstein, Dom Paschal, O.S.B. “Anselm Agonistes: The Dilemma of a Benedictine Made Bishop,”Faith and Reason, v. 13 (1997-8)
  • Baumstein, Dom Paschal, O.S.B. “Revisiting Anselm: Current Historical Studies and Controversies,”Cistercian Studies Quarterly, v. 28 (1993)
  • Baumstein, Dom Paschal, O.S.B. “St. Anselm and the Prospect of Perfection,” Faith and Reason, v. 29 (2004)
  • Bayert, J, S.J. “The Concept of Mystery According to St. Anselm of Canterbury,” Recherches de Théologie ancienne et médiévale, v. 9 (1937)
  • Châtillon, Jean. “De Guillaume d’Auxerre à S. Thomas d’Aquin: l’argument de S. Anselme chez les premiers scholastiques du XIIIe siècle,” Spicilegium Beccense, v. 1. (Paris: Vrin. 1959)
  • Cohen, Nicholas. “Feudal Imagery or Christian Tradition? A Defense of the Rationale for Anselm’s Cur Deus Homo,” The Saint Anselm Journal, v. 2, n. 1 (2004)
  • Corbin, Michel, S.J. “La significations de l’unum argumentum du Proslogion,” Anselm Studies, vol. 2 (1988)
  • Corbin, Michel, S.J. Prière et raison de la foi: introduction à l’œuvre de S. Anselme de Cantorbéry(Paris: Cerf. 1992)
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Author Information

Greg Sadler
Marist College and ReasonIO
U. S. A.

Sarvepalli Radhakrishnan (1888—1975)

Radhakrishnan_SAs an academic, philosopher, and statesman, Sarvepalli Radhakrishnan (1888-1975) was one of the most recognized and influential Indian thinkers in academic circles in the 20th century. Throughout his life and extensive writing career, Radhakrishnan sought to define, defend, and promulgate his religion, a religion he variously identified as Hinduism, Vedanta, and the religion of the Spirit. He sought to demonstrate that his Hinduism was both philosophically coherent and ethically viable. Radhakrishnan's concern for experience and his extensive knowledge of the Western philosophical and literary traditions has earned him the reputation of being a bridge-builder between India and the West. He often appears to feel at home in the Indian as well as the Western philosophical contexts, and draws from both Western and Indian sources throughout his writing. Because of this, Radhakrishnan has been held up in academic circles as a representative of Hinduism to the West. His lengthy writing career and his many published works have been influential in shaping the West's understanding of Hinduism, India, and the East.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography and Context
    1. Early Years (1888-1904)
    2. Madras Christian College (1904-1908)
    3. Early Teaching and Writing (1908-1912)
    4. The War, Tagore, and Mysore (1914-1920)
    5. Calcutta and the George V Chair (1921-1931)
    6. The 1930s and 1940s
    7. Post-Independence: Vice-presidency and Presidency
  2. Philosophy of Sarvepalli Radhakrishnan
    1. Metaphysics
    2. Epistemology: Intuition and the Varieties of Experience
      1. Intuition
      2. Varieties of Experience
        1. Cognitive Experience
        2. Psychic Experience
        3. Aesthetic Experience
        4. Ethical Experience
        5. Religious Experience
    3. Religious Pluralism
    4. Authority of Scripture and the Scientific Basis of Hinduism
    5. Practical Mysticism and Applied Ethics
      1. Ethics of Caste
  3. Criticism
    1. Epistemic Authority
    2. Cultural and Religious Constructions
    3. Selectivity of Evidence
  4. List of Abbreviations
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources by Radhakrishnan
    2. Selected Secondary Sources

1. Biography and Context

a. Early Years (1888-1904)

Rather little detail is known of Radhakrishnan's earliest childhood and education. Radhakrishnan rarely spoke about his personal life, and what he does reveal comes to us after several decades of reflection. Radhakrishnan was born in Tirutani, Andhra Pradesh into a brahmin family, likely smarta in religious orientation. Predominantly Hindu, Tirutani was a temple town and popular pilgrimage center, and Radhakrishnan's family were active participants in the devotional activities there. The implicit acceptance of Śaṅkara's Advaita by the smarta tradition is good evidence to suggest that an advaitic framework was an important, though latent, feature of Radhakrishnan's early philosophical and religious sensibilities.

In 1896, Radhakrishnan was sent to school in the nearby pilgrimage center of Tirupati, a town with a distinctively cosmopolitan flavor, drawing bhaktas from all parts of India. For four years, Radhakrishnan attended the Hermannsburg Evangelical Lutheran Missionary school. It was there that the young Radhakrishnan first encountered non-Hindu missionaries and 19th century Christian theology with its impulse toward personal religious experience. The theology taught in the missionary school may have found resonance with the highly devotional activities connected with the nearby Tirumala temple, activities that Radhakrishnan undoubtedly would have witnessed taking place outside the school. The shared emphasis on personal religious experience may have suggested to Radhakrishnan a common link between the religion of the missionaries and the religion practiced at the nearby Tirumala temple.

Between 1900 and 1904, Radhakrishnan attended Elizabeth Rodman Voorhees College in Vellore, a school run by the American Arcot Mission of the Reformed Church in America. The mandate of the Mission was to preach the gospel, to publish vernacular tracts, and to educate the "heathen" masses. It was here, as Robert Minor points out, that Radhakrishnan was "introduced to the Dutch Reform Theology, which emphasized a righteous God, unconditional grace, and election, and which criticized Hinduism as intellectually incoherent and ethically unsound." At the same time, the Mission demonstrated an active concern for education, health care, and social uplift through its participation in famine relief, the establishment of hospitals, and education for all irrespective of social status. Such activities were not inconsistent with the mandate of the Mission as they often served as incentives for conversion. In was in this atmosphere that Radhakrishnan encountered what would have appeared to him as crippling assaults on his Hindu sensibilities. He also would have witnessed the positive contributions of the social programs undertaken by the Mission in the name of propagation of the Christian gospel.

Thus, Radhakrishnan inherited from his upbringing a tacit acceptance of Śaṅkara's Advaita Vedanta and an awareness of the centrality of devotional practices associated with the smarta tradition. His experiences at Tirupati brought him into contact with Lutheran Christian missionaries whose theological emphasis on personal religious experience may have suggested to him a common ground between Christianity and his own religious heritage. In Vellore, the presence of a systematic social gospel was intimately bound up with the religion of those who sought to censure Radhakrishnan's cultural norms and religious worldview.

Radhakrishnan was married to his wife of over 50 years, Sivakamuamma, in 1904 while living in Vellore. The couple went on to have six children: five daughters and a son.

It is in this historical and hermeneutic contexts and with these experiences informing his worldview that Radhakrishnan encountered a resurgent Hinduism. Specifically, Radhakrishnan encountered the writings of Swami Vivekananda and V.D. Savarkar's The First War of Indian Independence. The Theosophical Society was also active in the South Arcot area at this time. The Theosophists not only applauded the ancient wisdom they claimed to have found in India, but were persistent advocates of a philosophical, spiritual, and scientific meeting of East and West. Moreover, the Society's role in the Indian nationalist movement is evidenced by Annie Besant's involvement with the Indian National Congress. While Radhakrishnan does not speak of the Theosophists presence at this time, it is unlikely that he would have been unfamiliar with their views.

What Vivekananda, Savarkar, and Theosophy did bring to Radhakrishnan was a sense of cultural self-confidence and self-reliance. However, the affirmation Radhakrishnan received from this resurgence of Hinduism did not push Radhakrishnan to study philosophy nor to interpret his own religion. It was only after Radhakrishnan's experiences at Madras Christian College that he began to put down in writing his own understanding of Hinduism.

b. Madras Christian College (1904-1908)

In 1904, Radhakrishnan entered Madras Christian College. At this time Radhakrishnan's academic sensibilities lay with the physical sciences, and before beginning his MA degree in 1906 his interest appears to have been law.

Two key influences on Radhakrishnan at Madras Christian College left an indelible stamp on Radhakrishnan's sensibilities. First, it was here that Radhakrishnan was trained in European philosophy. Radhakrishnan was introduced to the philosophies of Berkeley,LeibnizLockeSpinozaKantJ.S. MillHerbert SpencerFichteHegelAristotle, andPlato among others. Radhakrishnan was also introduced to the philosophical methods and theological views of his MA supervisor and most influential non-Indian mentor, Professor A.G. Hogg. Hogg was a Scottish Presbyterian missionary who was educated in the theology of Albrecht Ritschl and studied under the philosopher Andrew Seth Pringle-Pattison. As a student of Arthur Titius, himself a student of Albrecht Ritschl, Hogg adopted the Ritschlian distinction between religious value judgments, with their emphasis on subjective perception, and theoretical knowledge, which seeks to discover the nature of ultimate reality. Religious value judgments give knowledge which is different from, though not necessarily opposed to, theoretical knowledge. For Ritschl, and subsequently for Titius and Hogg, this distinction led to the conclusion that doctrines and scriptures are records of personal insights and are therefore necessary for religious, and specifically Christian, faith. This distinction left its mark on Radhakrishnan's philosophical and religious thinking and resonates throughout his writing.

A second key factor shaping Radhakrishnan's sensibilities during this time is that it was at Madras Christian College that Radhakrishnan encountered intense religious polemic in an academic setting. Radhakrishnan later recalled: "The challenge of Christian critics impelled me to make a study of Hinduism and find out what is living and what is dead in it... I prepared a thesis on the Ethics of the Vedanta, which was intended to be a reply to the charge that the Vedanta system had no room for ethics" (MST 19).

c. Early Teaching and Writing (1908-1912)

Upon the completion of his MA degree in 1908, Radhakrishnan found himself at both a financial and professional crossroads. His obligations to his family precluded him from applying for a scholarship to study in Britain and he struggled without success to find work in Madras. The following year, with the assistance of William Skinner at Madras Christian College, Radhakrishnan was able to secure what was intended to be a temporary teaching position at Presidency College in Madras.

At Presidency College, Radhakrishnan lectured on a variety of topics in psychology as well as in European philosophy. As a junior Assistant Professor, logic, epistemology and ethical theory were his stock areas of instruction. At the College, Radhakrishnan also learned Sanskrit.

During these years, Radhakrishnan was anxious to have his work published, not only by Indian presses but also in European journals. The Guardian Press in Madras published his MA thesis, and scarcely revised portions of this work appeared in Modern Review andThe Madras Christian College Magazine. While Radhakrishnan's efforts met with success in other Indian journals, it was not until his article "The Ethics of the Bhagavadgita and Kant" appeared in The International Journal of Ethics in 1911 that Radhakrishnan broke through to a substantial Western audience. As well, his edited lecture notes on psychology were published under the title Essentials of Psychology.

d. The War, Tagore, and Mysore (1914-1920)

By 1914, Radhakrishnan's reputation as a scholar was beginning to grow. However, the security of a permanent academic post in Madras eluded him. For three months in 1916 he was posted to Anantapur, Andhra Pradesh, and in 1917 he was transferred yet again, this time to Rajahmundry. Only after spending a year in Rajahmundry did Radhakrishnan find some degree of professional security upon his acceptance of a position in philosophy at Mysore University. This hiatus in his occupational angst would be short lived. His most prestigious Indian academic appointment to the George V Chair in Philosophy at Calcutta University in February of 1921 would take him out of South India for the first time only two and a half years later.

Between 1914 and 1920, Radhakrishnan continued to publish. He authored eighteen articles, ten of which were published in prominent Western journals such as The International Journal of EthicsThe Monist, and Mind. Throughout these articles, Radhakrishnan took it upon himself to refine and expand upon his interpretation of Hinduism.

There is a strong polemical tenor to many of these articles. Radhakrishnan was no longer content simply to define and defend Vedanta. Instead, he sought to confront directly not only Vedanta's Western competitors, but what he saw as the Western philosophical enterprise and the Western ethos in general.

Radhakrishnan's polemical sensibilities during these years were heightened in no small part by the political turmoil both on the Indian as well as on the world stage. Radhakrishnan's articles and books during this period reflect his desire to offer a sustainable philosophical response to the unfolding discontent he encountered. World War One and its aftermath, and in particular the events in Amritsar in the spring of 1919, further exacerbated Radhakrishnan's patience with what he saw as an irrational, dogmatic, and despotic West. Radhakrishnan's 1920 The Reign of Religion in Contemporary Philosophy is indicative of his heightened polemical sensibilities during this period.

A more positive factor in Radhakrishnan's life during these years was his reading of Rabindranath Tagore, the Bengali poet. Radhakrishnan joined the rest of the English-speaking world in 1912 in reading Tagore's translated works. Though the two had never met at this time, Tagore would become perhaps Radhakrishnan's most influential Indian mentor. Tagore's poetry and prose resonated with Radhakrishnan. He appreciated Tagore's emphasis on aesthetics as well as his appeal to intuition. From 1914 on, both of these notions -- aesthetics and intuition -- begin to find their place in Radhakrishnan's own interpretations of experience, the epistemological category for his philosophical and religious proclivities. Over the next five decades, Radhakrishnan would repeatedly appeal to Tagore's writing to support his own philosophical ideals.

e. Calcutta and the George V Chair (1921-1931)

In 1921, Radhakrishnan took up the prestigious George V Chair in Philosophy at Calcutta University. As an honored, though hesitant, heir to Brajendranath Seal, Radhakrishnan's appointment to the chair was not without its dissenters who sought a fellow Bengali for the position. In Calcutta, Radhakrishnan was for the first time out of his South Indian element -- geographically, culturally, and linguistically.

However, the isolation Radhakrishnan experienced during his early years in Calcutta allowed him to work on his two volume Indian Philosophy, the first of which he began while in Mysore and published in 1923 and the second followed four years later. Throughout the 1920s, Radhakrishnan's reputation as a scholar continued to grow both in India and abroad. He was invited to Oxford to give the 1926 Upton Lectures, published in 1927 as The Hindu View of Life, and in 1929 Radhakrishnan delivered theHibbert Lectures, later published under the title An Idealist View of Life. The later of these two Views is Radhakrishnan's most sustained, non-commentarial work. An Idealist View of Life is frequently seen as Radhakrishnan's mature work and has undoubtedly received the bulk of scholarly attention on Radhakrishnan.

While Radhakrishnan enjoyed a growing scholarly repute, he was also confronted in Calcutta with growing conflict and confrontation. The events of Amritsar in 1919 did little to encourage positive relations between Indians and the British Raj; and Gandhi's on again-off again Rowlatt satyagraha was proving ineffective in cultivating a united Indian voice. The ambiguity of the Montagu-Chelmsford Reforms with their olive branch for "responsible government" further fragmented an already divided Congress. The Khalifat movement splintered the Indian Muslim community, and aggravated the growing animosity between its supporters and those, Muslim or otherwise, who saw it as a side issue to swaraj (self-rule). But the racial paternalism of the 1927 Simon Commission prompted a resurgence of nationalist sentiment. While Indian solidarity and protest received international attention, due in no small part to the media coverage of Gandhi's Salt March, such national unity was readily shaken. Indian political consensus, much less swaraj, proved elusive. Communal division and power struggles on the part of Indians and a renewed conservatism in Britain crippled the London Round Table Conferences of the early 1930s, reinforcing and perpetuating an already highly fragmented and politically volatile India.

With the publication of An Idealist View of Life, Radhakrishnan had come into his own philosophically. In his mind, he had identified the "religious" problem, reviewed the alternatives, and posited a solution. An unreflective dogmatism could not be remedied by escaping from "experiential religion" which is the true basis of all religions. Rather, a recognition of the creative potency of integral experience tempered by a critical scientific attitude was, Radhakrishnan believed, the only viable corrective to dogmatic claims of exclusivity founded on external, second-hand authority. Moreover, while Hinduism (Advaita Vedanta) as he defined it best exemplified his position, Radhakrishnan claimed that the genuine philosophical, theological, and literary traditions in India and the West supported his position.

f. The 1930s and 1940s

Radhakrishnan was knighted in 1931, the same year he took up his administrative post as Vice Chancellor at the newly founded, though scarcely constructed, Andhra University at Waltair. Sir Radhakrishnan served there for five years as Vice Chancellor, when, in 1936, not only did the university in Calcutta affirm his position in perpetuity but Oxford University appointed him to the H.N. Spalding Chair of Eastern Religions and Ethics. In late 1939, Radhakrishnan took up his second Vice Chancellorship at Benares Hindu University (BHU), and served there during the course of the second world war until mid-January 1948, two weeks before Gandhi's assassination in New Delhi.

Shortly after his resignation from BHU, Radhakrishnan was named chairman of the University Education Commission. The Commission's 1949 Report assessed the state of university education and made recommendations for its improvement in the newly independent India. Though co-authored by others, Radhakrishnan's hand is felt especially in the chapters on The Aims of University Education and Religious Education.

During these years, the question of nationalism occupied Radhakrishnan's attention. The growing communalism Radhakrishnan had witnessed in the 1920s was further intensified with the ideological flowering of the Hindu Mahasabha under the leadership of Bhai Parmanand and his heir V.D. Savarkar. Likewise, Muhammad Iqbal's 1930 poetic vision and call for Muslim self-assertion furnished Muhammad Jinnah with an ideological template in which to lay claim to an independent Pakistan. This claim was given recognition at the Round Table Conferences in London early that decade. If the Montagu-Chelmsford Reforms had in the 1920s served to fracture already fragile political alliances, its 1935 progeny as the Government of India Act with its promise for greater self-government further crowded the political stage and divided those groups struggling for their share of power. During these years, the spectrum of nationalist vision was as broad as Indian solidarity was elusive.

The issues of education and nationalism come together for Radhakrishnan during this period. For Radhakrishnan, a university education which quickened the development of the whole individual was the only responsible and practical means to the creation of Indian solidarity and clarity of national vision. Throughout the 1930s and 1940s, Radhakrishnan expressed his vision of an autonomous India. He envisioned an India built and guided by those who were truly educated, by those who had a personal vision of and commitment to raising Indian self-consciousness.

g. Post-Independence: Vice-presidency and Presidency

The years following Indian independence mark Radhakrishnan's increasing involvement in Indian political as well as in international affairs. The closing years of the 1940s were busy ones. Radhakrishnan had been actively involved in the newly incorporated UNESCO (United Nations Educational, Scientific, and Cultural Organization), serving on its Executive Board as well as leading the Indian delegation from 1946-1951. Radhakrishnan also served for the two years immediately following India's independence as a member of the Indian Constituent Assembly. Radhakrishnan's time and energy to UNESCO and the Constituent Assembly had also to be shared by the demands of the University Commission and his continuing obligations as Spalding Professor at Oxford.

With the Report of the Universities Commission complete in 1949, Radhakrishnan was appointed by then Prime Minister Jawaharlal Nehru as Indian Ambassador to Moscow, a post he held until 1952. The opportunity for Radhakrishnan to put into practice his own philosophical-political ideals came with his election to the Raja Sabha, in which he served as India's Vice-President (1952-1962) and later as President (1962-1967).

Radhakrishnan saw during his terms in office an increasing need for world unity and universal fellowship. The urgency of this need was pressed home to Radhakrishnan by what he saw as the unfolding crises throughout the world. At the time of his taking up the office of Vice-President, the Korean war was already in full swing. Political tensions with China in the early 1960s followed by the hostilities between India and Pakistan dominated Radhakrishnan's presidency. Moreover, the Cold War divided East and West leaving each side suspicious of the other and on the defensive.

Radhakrishnan challenged what he saw as the divisive potential and dominating character of self-professed international organizations such as the League of Nations. Instead, he called for the promotion of a creative internationalism based on the spiritual foundations of integral experience. Only then could understanding and tolerance between peoples and between nations be promoted.

Radhakrishnan retired from public life in 1967. He spent the last eight years of his life at the home he built in Mylapore, Madras. Radhakrishnan died on April 17, 1975.

2. Philosophy of Sarvepalli Radhakrishnan

a. Metaphysics

Radhakrishnan located his metaphysics within the Advaita (non-dual) Vedanta tradition (sampradaya). And like other Vedantins before him, Radhakrishnan wrote commentaries on the Prasthanatraya (that is, main primary texts of Vedanta ): the Upanisads (1953),Brahma Sutra (1959), and the Bhagavadgita (1948).

As an Advaitin, Radhakrishnan embraced a metaphysical idealism. But Radhakrishnan's idealism was such that it recognized the reality and diversity of the world of experience (prakṛti) while at the same time preserving the notion of a wholly transcendent Absolute (Brahman), an Absolute that is identical to the self (Atman). While the world of experience and of everyday things is certainly not ultimate reality as it is subject to change and is characterized by finitude and multiplicity, it nonetheless has its origin and support in the Absolute (Brahman) which is free from all limits, diversity, and distinctions (nirguṇa). Brahman is the source of the world and its manifestations, but these modes do not affect the integrity of Brahman.

In this vein, Radhakrishnan did not merely reiterate the metaphysics of Śaṅkara (8th century C.E.), arguably Advaita Vedanta's most prominent and enduring figure, but sought to reinterpret Advaita for present needs. In particular, Radhakrishnan reinterpreted what he saw as Śaṅkara's understanding of maya strictly as illusion. For Radhakrishnan, maya ought not to be understood to imply a strict objective idealism, one in which the world is taken to be inherently disconnected from Brahman, but rather mayaindicates, among other things, a subjective misperception of the world as ultimately real. [See Donald Braue, Maya in Radhakrishnan's Thought: Six Meanings Other Than Illusion(1985) for a full treatment of this issue.]

b. Epistemology: Intuition and the Varieties of Experience

This section deals with Radhakrishnan's understanding of intuition and his interpretations of experience. It begins with a general survey of the variety of terms as well as the characteristics Radhakrishnan associates with intuition. It then details with how Radhakrishnan understands specific occurrences of intuition in relation to other forms of experience -- cognitive, psychic, aesthetic, ethical, and religious.

i. Intuition

Radhakrishnan associates a vast constellation of terms with intuition. At its best, intuition is an "integral experience". Radhakrishnan uses the term "integral" in at least three ways. First, intuition is integral in the sense that it coordinates and synthesizes all other experiences. It integrates all other experiences into a more unified whole. Second, intuition is integral as it forms the basis of all other experiences. In other words, Radhakrishnan holds that all experiences are at bottom intuitional. Third, intuition is integral in the sense that the results of the experience are integrated into the life of the individual. For Radhakrishnan, intuition finds expression in the world of action and social relations.

At times Radhakrishnan prefers to emphasize the "mystical" and "spiritual" quality of intuition as attested to by the expressions "religious experience" (IVL 91), "religious consciousness" (IVL 199), "mystical experience" (IVL 88), "spiritual idealism" (IVL 87), "self-existent spiritual experience" (IVL 99), "prophetic indications" and "the real ground in man's deepest being" (IVL 103), "spiritual apprehension" (IVL 103), "moments of vision" (IVL 94), "revelation" (IVL 210), "supreme light" (IVL 206), and even "faith" (IVL 199). But it is the creative potency of intuition, designated by Radhakrishnan's reference to the "creative center" of the individual (IVL 113), "creative intuition" (IVL 205), "creative spirit" (IVL 206), and "creative energy" (IVL 205), that is the lynchpin for Radhakrishnan's understanding of intuition. As Radhakrishnan understands it, all progress is the result of the creative potency of intuition.

For Radhakrishnan, intuition is a distinct form of experience. Intuition is of a self-certifying character (svatassiddha). It is sufficient and complete. It is self-established (svatasiddha), self-evidencing (svāsaṃvedya), and self-luminous (svayam-prakāsa) (IVL 92). Intuition entails pure comprehension, entire significance, complete validity (IVL 93). It is both truth-filled and truth-bearing (IVL 93). Intuition is its own cause and its own explanation (IVL 92). It is sovereign (IVL 92). Intuition is a positive feeling of calm and confidence, joy and strength (IVL 93). Intuition is profoundly satisfying (IVL 93). It is peace, power and joy (IVL 93).

Intuition is the ultimate form of experience for Radhakrishnan. It is ultimate in the sense that intuition constitutes the fullest and therefore the most authentic realization of the Real (Brahman). The ultimacy of intuition is also accounted for by Radhakrishnan in that it is the ground of all other forms of experience.

Intuition is a self-revelation of the divine. Intuitive experience is immediate. Immediacy does not imply in Radhakrishnan's mind an "absence of psychological mediation, but only non-mediation by conscious thought" (IVL 98). Intuition operates on a supra-conscious level, unmediated as it is by conscious thought. Even so, Radhakrishnan holds that there is "no such thing as pure experience, raw and undigested. It is always mixed up with layers of interpretation" (IVL 99). One might object here that Radhakrishnan has conflated the experience itself with its subsequent interpretation and expression. However, Radhakrishnan's comment is an attempt to deny the Hegelian interpretation of Hinduism's "contentless" experience, affirming instead that intuition is the plenitude of experience.

Finally, intuition, according to Radhakrishnan, is ineffable. It escapes the limits of language and logic, and there is "no conception by which we can define it" (IVL 96). In such experiences "[t]hought and reality coalesce and a creative merging of subject and object results" (IVL 92). While the experience itself transcends expression, it also provokes it (IVL 95). The provocation of expression is, for Radhakrishnan, testimony to the creative impulse of intuition. All creativity and indeed all progress in the various spheres of life is the inevitable result of intuition.

ii. Varieties of Experience

1) Cognitive Experience

Radhakrishnan recognizes three categories of cognitive experience: sense experience, discursive reasoning, and intuitive apprehension. For Radhakrishnan all of these forms of experience contribute, in varying degrees, to a knowledge of the real (Brahman), and as such have their basis in intuition.

Sense Experience

Of the cognitive forms of knowledge, Radhakrishnan suggests that sensory knowledge is in one respect closest to intuition, for it is in the act of sensing that one is in "direct contact" with the object. Sense experience "helps us to know the outer characters of the external world. By means of it we acquire an acquaintance with the sensible qualities of the objects" (IVL 134). "Intuitions," Radhakrishnan believes, "are convictions arising out of a fullness of life in a spontaneous way, more akin to sense than to imagination or intellect and more inevitable than either" (IVL 180). In this sense, sense perception may be considered intuitive, though Radhakrishnan does not explicitly describe it as such.

Discursive Reasoning

Discursive reasoning, and the logical knowledge it produces, is subsequent to sensory experience (perception). "Logical knowledge is obtained by the processes of analysis and synthesis. Unlike sense perception which Radhakrishnan claims to be closer to direct knowledge, logical knowledge "is indirect and symbolic in its character. It helps us to handle and control the object and its workings" (IVL 134). There is a paradoxical element here. Radhakrishnan seems to be suggesting that the direct proximity to an external object one encounters in sense perception is compromised when the perception is interpreted and subsequently incorporated into a more systematic, though presumably higher, form of knowledge through discursive reasoning.

For Radhakrishnan, discursive reasoning and the logical systems they construct possess an element of intuition. The methodical, mechanical working through of logical problems and the reworking of rational systems cannot be divorced from what Radhakrishnan might call an "intuitive hunch" that such a course of action will bear positive results; "In any concrete act of thinking the mind's active experience is both intuitive and intellectual" (IVL 181-182).

Intuitive Apprehension

Radhakrishnan argues against what he sees as the prevalent (Western) temptation to reduce the intuitive to the logical. While logic deals with facts already known, intuition goes beyond logic to reveal previously unseen connections between facts. "The art of discovery is confused with the logic of proof and an artificial simplification of the deeper movements of thought results. We forget that we invent by intuition though we prove by logic" (IVL 177). Intuition not only clarifies the relations between facts and seemingly discordant systems, but lends itself to the discovery of new knowledge which then becomes an appropriate subject of philosophical inquiry and logical analysis.

Claiming to take his cue from his former adversary Henri Bergson, Radhakrishnan offers three explanations to account for the tendency to overlook the presence of intuition in discursive reasoning. First, Radhakrishnan claims, intuition presupposes a rational knowledge of facts. "The insight does not arise if we are not familiar with the facts of the case.... The successful practice of intuition requires previous study and assimilation of a multitude of facts and laws. We may take it that great intuitions arise out of a matrix of rationality" (IVL 177). Second, the intuitive element is often obscured in discursive reasoning because facts known prior to the intuition are retained, though they are synthesized, and perhaps reinterpreted, in light of the intuitive insight. "The readjustment [of previously known facts] is so easy that when the insight is attained it escapes notice and we imagine that the process of discovery is only rational synthesis" (IVL 177). Finally, intuition in discursive reasoning is often overlooked, disguised as it is in the language of logic. In short, the intuitive is mistaken for the logical. "Knowledge when acquired must be thrown into logical form and we are obliged to adopt the language of logic since only logic has a communicable language." This last is a perplexing claim since elsewhere Radhakrishnan clearly recognizes that meaning is conveyed in symbols, poetry, and metaphors. Perhaps what Radhakrishnan means is that logic is the only valid means by which we are able to organize and systematize empirical facts. Regardless, according to Radhakrishnan, the presentation of facts in logical form contributes to "a confusion between discovery and proof" (IVL 177).

Conversely, Radhakrishnan offers a positive argument for the place of intuition in discursive reasoning. "If the process of discovery were mere synthesis, any mechanical manipulator of prior partial concepts would have reached the insight and it would not have taken a genius to arrive at it" (IVL 178). A purely mechanical account of discursive reasoning ignores the inherently creative and dynamic dimension of intuitive insight. In Radhakrishnan's view the mechanical application of logic alone is creatively empty (IVL 181).

However, Radhakrishnan holds that the "creative insight is not the final link in a chain of reasoning. If it were that, it would not strike us as "inspired in its origin" (IVL 178). Intuition is not the end, but part of an ever-developing and ever-dynamic process of realization. There is, for Radhakrishnan, a continual system of "checks and balances" between intuition and the logical method of discursive reasoning. Cognitive intuitions "are not substitutes for thought, they are challenges to intelligence. Mere intuitions are blind while intellectual work is empty. All processes are partly intuitive and partly intellectual. There is no gulf between the two" (IVL 181).

2) Psychic Experience

Perhaps the most understudied dimension of Radhakrishnan's interpretations of experience is his recognition of "supernormal" experiences. As early as his first volume of Indian Philosophy (1923), Radhakrishnan affirms the validity of what he identifies as "psychic phenomena". Radhakrishnan accounts for such experiences in terms of a highly developed sensitivity to intuition. "The mind of man," Radhakrishnan explains, "has the three aspects of subconscious, the conscious, and the superconscious, and the ‘abnormal' psychic phenomena, called by the different names of ecstasy, genius, inspiration, madness, are the workings of the superconscious mind" (IP1 28). Such experiences are not "abnormal" according to Radhakrishnan, nor are they unscientific. Rather, they are the products of carefully controlled mental experiments. In the Indian past, "The psychic experiences, such as telepathy and clairvoyance, were considered to be neither abnormal nor miraculous. They are not the products of diseased minds or inspiration from the gods, but powers which the human mind can exhibit under carefully ascertained conditions" (IP1 28). Psychic intuitions are not askew with Radhakrishnan's understanding of the intellect. In fact, they are evidence of the remarkable heights to which the undeveloped, limited intellect is capable. They are, for Radhakrishnan, accomplishments rather than failures of human consciousness.

As highly developed powers of apprehension, psychic experiences are a state of consciousness "beyond the understanding of the normal, and the supernormal is traced to the supernatural" (IVL 94). Moreover, in what Radhakrishnan might recognize as an "intuitive hunch" in the articulation of a new scientific hypothesis, psychic premonitions, as partial or momentary as they may be, lend themselves to the "psychic hypothesis" that the universal spirit is inherent in the nature of all things (IVL 110). For Radhakrishnan, psychic intuitions are suprasensory: "We can see objects without the medium of the senses and discern relations spontaneously without building them up laboriously. In other words, we can discern every kind of reality directly" (IVL 143). In a bold, albeit highly problematic, declaration, Radhakrishnan believes that the "facts of telepathy prove that one mind can communicate with another directly"(IVL 143).

3) Aesthetic Experience

"All art," Radhakrishnan declares, "is the expression of experience in some medium" (IVL 182). However, the artistic experience should not be confused with its expression. While the experience itself is ineffable, the challenge for the artist is to give the experience concrete expression. "The success of art is measured by the extent to which it is able to render experiences of one dimension into terms of another. (IVL 187) For Radhakrishnan, art born out of a "creative contemplation which is a process of travail of the spirit is an authentic "crystallization of a life process" (IVL 185). At its ultimate and in its essence, the "poetical character is derived from the creative intuition (that is, integral intuition) which holds sound, suggestion and sense in organic solution" (IVL 191).

In Radhakrishnan's view, without the intuitive experience, art becomes mechanical and a rehearsal of old themes. Such "art" is an exercise in (re)production rather than a communication of the artist's intuitive encounter with reality. "Technique without inspiration," Radhakrishnan declares, "is barren. Intellectual powers, sense facts and imaginative fancies may result in clever verses, repetition of old themes, but they are only manufactured poetry" (IVL 188). It is not simply a difference of quality but a "difference of kind in the source itself" (IVL 189). For Radhakrishnan, true art is an expression of the whole personality, seized as it was with the creative impulse of the universe.

Artistic intuition mitigates and subdues rational reflection. But "[e]ven in the act of composition," Radhakrishnan believes, "the poet is in a state in which the reflective elements are subordinated to the intuitive. The vision, however, is not operative for so long as it continues, its very stress acts as a check on expression" (IVL 187).

For Radhakrishnan, artistic expression is dynamic. Having had the experience, the artist attempts to recall it. The recollection of the intuition, Radhakrishnan believes, is not a plodding reconstruction, nor one of dispassionate analysis. Rather, there is an emotional vibrancy: "The experience is recollected not in tranquility... but in excitement" (IVL 187). To put the matter somewhat differently, the emotional vibrancy of the aesthetic experience gives one knowledge by being rather than knowledge by knowing (IVL 184).

Art and Science

There is in Radhakrishnan's mind a "scientific" temperament to genuine artistic expression. In what might be called the science of art, Radhakrishnan believes that the "experience or the vision is the artist's counterpart to the scientific discovery of a principle or law" (IVL 184). There is a concordance of agendas in art and science. "What the scientist does when he discovers a new law is to give a new ordering to observed facts. The artist is engaged in a similar task. He gives new meaning to our experience and organizes it in a different way due to his perception of subtler qualities in reality" (IVL 194).

Despite this synthetic impulse, Radhakrishnan is careful to explain that the two disciplines are not wholly the same. The difference turns on what he sees as the predominantly aesthetic and qualitative nature of artistic expression. "Poetic truth is different from scientific truth since it reveals the real in its qualitative uniqueness and not in its quantitative universality" (IVL 193). Presumably, Radhakrishnan means that, unlike the universal laws with which science attempts to grapple, art is much more subjective, not in its creative origin, but in its expression. A further distinction between the two may lend further insight into Radhakrishnan's open appreciation for the poetic medium. "Poetry," he believes, "is the language of the soul, while prose is the language of science. The former is the language of mystery, of devotion, of religion. Prose lays bare its whole meaning to the intelligence, while poetry plunges us in the mysterium tremendum of life and suggests the truths that cannot be stated" (IVL 191).

4) Ethical Experience

Not surprisingly, intuition finds a place in Radhakrishnan's ethics. For Radhakrishnan, ethical experiences are profoundly transformative. The experience resolves dilemmas and harmonizes seemingly discordant paths of possible action. "If the new harmony glimpsed in the moments of insight is to be achieved, the old order of habits must be renounced" (IVL 114). Moral intuitions result in "a redemption of our loyalties and a remaking of our personalities" (IVL 115).

That Radhakrishnan conceives of the ethical development of the individual as a form of conversion is noteworthy as it underscores Radhakrishnan's identification of ethics and religion. For Radhakrishnan, an ethical transformation of the kind brought about by intuition is akin to religious growth and heightened realization. The force of this view is underscored by Radhakrishnan's willing acceptance of the interchangeability of the terms "intuition" and "religious experience".

Of course, not all ethical decisions or actions possess the quality of being guided by an intuitive impulse. Radhakrishnan willingly concedes that the vast majority of moral decisions are the result of conformity to well-established moral codes. However, it is in times of moral crisis that the creative force of ethical intuitions come to the fore. In a less famous, though thematically reminiscent analogy, Radhakrishnan accounts for growth of moral consciousness in terms of the creative intuitive impulse: "In the chessboard of life, the different pieces have powers which vary with the context and the possibilities of their combination are numerous and unpredictable. The sound player has a sense of right and feels that, if he does not follow it, he will be false to himself. In any critical situation the forward move is a creative act" (IVL 196-197).

By definition, moral actions are socially rooted. As such the effects of ethical intuitions are played out on the social stage. While the intuition itself is an individual achievement, Radhakrishnan's view is that the intuition must be not only translated into positive and creative action but shared with others. There is a sense of urgency, if not inevitability, about this. Radhakrishnan tells us one "cannot afford to be absolutely silent" (IVL 97) and the saints "love because they cannot help it" (IVL 116).

The impulse to share the moral insight provides an opportunity to test the validity of the intuition against reason. The moral hero, as Radhakrishnan puts it, does not live by intuition alone. The intuitive experience, while it is the creative guiding impulse behind all moral progress, must be checked and tested against reason. There is a "scientific" and "experimental" dimension to Radhakrishnan's understanding of ethical behavior. Those whose lives are profoundly transformed and who are guided by the ethical experience are, for Radhakrishnan, moral heroes. To Radhakrishnan's mind, the moral hero, guided as he or she is by the ethical experience, who carves out an adventurous path is akin to the discoverer who brings order into the scattered elements of a science or the artist who composes a piece of music or designs buildings" (IVL 196). In a sense, there is very much an art and science to ethical living.

Radhakrishnan's moral heroes, having developed a "large impersonality" (IVL 116) in which the joy, freedom and bliss of a life uninhibited by the constraints of ego and individuality are realized, become "self-sacrificing" exemplars for others. "Feeling the unity of himself and the universe, the man who lives in spirit is no more a separate and self-centered individual but a vehicle of the universal spirit" (IVL 115). Like the artist, the moral hero does not turn his back on the world. Instead, "[h]e throws himself on the world and lives for its redemption, possessed as he is with an unshakable sense of optimism and an unlimited faith in the powers of the soul" (IVL 116). In short, Radhakrishnan's moral hero is a conduit whose "world-consciousness" delights "in furthering the plan of the cosmos" (IVL 116).

Radhakrishnan believes that ethical intuitions at their deepest transcend conventional and mechanically constructed ethical systems. Moral heroes exemplify Radhakrishnan's ethical ideal while at the same time provoking in those who accept the ethical status quo to evaluate and to reconsider less than perfect moral codes. As the moral hero is "fighting for the reshaping of his own society on sounder lines [his] behavior might offend the sense of decorum of the cautious conventionalist" (IVL 197). The contribution of ethically realized individuals is their promotion of moral progress in the world. "Though morality commands conformity, all moral progress is due to nonconformists" (IVL 197). The moral hero is no longer guided by external moral codes, but by an "inner rhythm" of harmony between self and the universe revealed to him in the intuitive experience. "By following his deeper nature, he may seem to be either unwise or unmoral to those of us who adopt conventional standards. But for him the spiritual obligation is more of a consequence than social tradition" (IVL 197).

5) Religious Experience

For the sake of clarity, we must at the outset make a tentative distinction between religious experience on the one hand and integral experience on the other. Radhakrishnan's distinction between "religion" and "religions" will be helpful here. At its most basic, religions, for Radhakrishnan, represent the various interpretations of experience, while integral experience is the essence of all religions. "If experience is the soul of religion, expression is the body through which it fulfills its destiny. We have the spiritual facts and their interpretations by which they are communicated to others" (IVL 90). "It is the distinction between immediacy and thought. Intuitions abide, while interpretations change" (IVL 90). But the interpretations should not be confused with the experiences themselves. For Radhakrishnan, "[c]onceptual expressions are tentative and provisional... [because] the intellectual accounts... are constructed theories of experience" (IVL 119). And he cautions us to "distinguish between the immediate experience or intuition which might conceivably be infallible and the interpretation which is mixed up with it" (IVL 99).

For Radhakrishnan, the creeds and theological formulations of religion are but intellectual representations and symbols of experience. "The idea of God," Radhakrishnan affirms, "is an interpretation of experience" (IVL 186). It follows here that religious experiences are, for Radhakrishnan, context relative and therefore imperfect. They are informed by and experienced through specific cultural, historical, linguistic and religious lenses. Because of their contextuality and subsequent intellectualization, experiences in the religious sphere are limited. It is in this sense that we may refer to experiences which occur under the auspices of one or other of the religions as "religious experiences". Radhakrishnan spends little time dealing with "religious experiences" as they occur in specific religious traditions. And what little he does say is used to demonstrate the theological preconditioning and "religious" relativity of such experiences. However, "religious experiences" have value for Radhakrishnan insofar as they offer the possibility of heightening one's religious consciousness and bringing one into ever closer proximity to "religious intuition".

Much to the confusion and chagrin of readers of Radhakrishnan, Radhakrishnan uses "religious experience" to refer to such "sectarian" religious experiences (as discussed immediately above) as well as to refer to "religious intuitions" which transcend narrow sectarian and religious boundaries and are identical to intuition itself (taken up in the section on "Intuition" above (B.I.) and revisited immediately below).

Radhakrishnan is explicit and emphatic in his view that religious intuition is a unique form of experience. Religious intuition is more than simply the confluence of the cognitive, aesthetic, and ethical sides of life. However vital and significant these sides of life may be, they are but partial and fragmented constituents of a greater whole, a whole which is experienced in its fullness and immediacy in religious intuition.

To Radhakrishnan's mind, religious intuition is not only an autonomous form of experience, but a form of experience which informs and validates all spheres of life and experience. Philosophical, artistic, and ethical values of truth, beauty, and goodness are not known through the senses or by reason. Rather, "they are apprehended by intuition or faith..." (IVL 199-200). For Radhakrishnan, religious intuition informs, conjoins, and transcends an otherwise fragmentary consciousness.

Informing Radhakrishnan's interpretation of religious intuition is his affirmation of the identity of the self and ultimate reality. Throughout his life, Radhakrishnan interpreted the Upaniṣadic mahavakya, tat tvam asi, as a declaration of the non-duality (advaita) of Atman and Brahman. His advaitic interpretation allows him to affirm the ineffability of the truth behind the formula. Radhakrishnan readily appropriates his acceptance of the non-dual experience to his interpretation of religious intuition. Radhakrishnan not only claimed to find support for his views in the Upaniṣads, but believed that, correctly understood, the ancient sages expounded his interpretation of religious intuition. Any attempt at interpretation of the intuition could only approximate the truth of the experience itself. As the ultimate realization, religious intuition must not only account for and bring together all other forms of experience, but must overcome the distinctions between them. Radhakrishnan goes so far as to claim that intuition of this sort is the essence of religion. All religions are informed by it, though all fail to varying degrees to interpret it. "Here we find the essence of religion, which is a synthetic realization of life. The religious man has the knowledge that everything is significant, the feeling that there is harmony underneath the conflicts and the power to realize the significance and the harmony" (IVL 201).

With this, the present discussion of intuition and the varieties of experience has come full circle. Radhakrishnan identifies intuition -- in all its contextual varieties -- with integral experience. The two expressions are, for Radhakrishnan, synonymous. Integral experience coordinates and synthesizes the range of life's experiences. It furnishes the individual with an ever-deepening awareness of and appreciation for the unity of Reality. As an intuition, integral experience is not only the basis of all experience but the source of all creative ingenuity, whether such innovation be philosophical, scientific, moral, artistic, or religious. Moreover, not only does integral experience find expression in these various spheres of life, but such expression, Radhakrishnan believes, quickens the intuitive and creative impulse among those it touches.

c. Religious Pluralism

Radhakrishnan's hierarchy of religions is well-known. "Hinduism," Radhakrishnan affirms, "accepts all religious notions as facts and arranges them in the order of their more or less intrinsic significance": "The worshippers of the Absolute are the highest in rank; second to them are the worshippers of the personal God; then come the worshippers of the incarnations like Rama, Kṛṣṇa, Buddha; below them are those who worship ancestors, deities and sages, and the lowest of all are the worshippers of the petty forces and spirits" (HVL 32).

Radhakrishnan uses his distinctions between experience and interpretation, between religion and religions, to correlate his brand of Hinduism (that is, Advaita Vedanta ) with religion itself. "Religion," Radhakrishnan holds, is "a kind of life or experience." It is an insight into the nature of reality (darsana), or experience of reality (anubhava). It is "a specific attitude of the self, itself and not other" (HVL 15). In a short, but revealing passage, Radhakrishnan characterizes religion in terms of "personal experience." It is "an independent functioning of the human mind, something unique, possessing and autonomous character. It is something inward and personal which unifies all values and organizes all experiences. It is the reaction to the whole of man to the whole of reality. [It] may be called spiritual life, as distinct from a merely intellectual or moral or aesthetic activity or a combination of them" (IVL 88-89).

For Radhakrishnan, integral intuitions are the authority for, and the soul of, religion (IVL 89-90). It is here that we find a critical coalescence of ideas in Radhakrishnan's thinking. If, as Radhakrishnan claims, personal intuitive experience and inner realization are the defining features of Advaita Vedanta , and those same features are the "authority" and "soul" of religion as he understands it, Radhakrishnan is able to affirm with the confidence he does: "The Vedanta is not a religion, but religion itself in its most universal and deepest significance" (HVL 23).

For Radhakrishnan, Hinduism at its Vedantic best is religion. Other religions, including what Radhakrishnan understands as lower forms of Hinduism, are interpretations of Advaita Vedanta . Religion and religions are related in Radhakrishnan's mind as are experience and interpretation. The various religions are merely interpretations of his Vedanta. In a sense, Radhakrishnan "Hinduizes" all religions. Radhakrishnan appropriates traditional exegetical categories to clarify further the relationship: "We have spiritual facts and their interpretations by which they are communicated to others, śruti or what is heard, and smṛti or what is remembered. Śaṅkara equates them with pratyakṣa or intuition and anumana or inference. It is the distinction between immediacy and thought. Intuitions abide, while interpretations change" (IVL 90).

The apologetic force of this brief statement is clear. For Radhakrishnan, the intuitive, experiential immediacy of Advaita Vedanta is the genuine authority for all religions, and all religions as intellectually mediated interpretations derive from and must ultimately defer to Advaita Vedanta . Put succinctly: "While the experiential character of religion is emphasized in the Hindu faith, every religion at its best falls back on it" (IVL 90).

For Radhakrishnan, the religions are not on an even footing in their approximations and interpretations of a common experience. To the extent that all traditions are informed by what Radhakrishnan claims to be a common ground of experience (that is, Advaita Vedanta ), each religion has value. At the same time, all religions as interpretations leave room for development and spiritual progress. "While no tradition coincides with experience, every tradition is essentially unique and valuable. While all traditions are of value, none is finally binding" (IVL 120). Moreover, according to Radhakrishnan, the value of each religion is determined by its proximity to Radhakrishnan's understanding of Vedanta.

d. Authority of Scripture and the Scientific Basis of Hinduism

Radhakrishnan argues that Hinduism, as he understands it, is a scientific religion. According to Radhakrishnan, "[i]f philosophy of religion is to become scientific, it must become empirical and found itself on religious experience" (IVL 184). True religion, argues Radhakrishnan, remains open to experience and encourages an experimental attitude with regard to its experiential data. Hinduism more than any other religion exemplifies this scientific attitude. "The Hindu philosophy of religion starts from and returns to an experimental basis" (HVL 19). Unlike other religions, which set limits on the types of spiritual experience, the "Hindu thinker readily admits of other points of view than his own and considers them to be just as worthy of attention" (HVL 19). What sets Hinduism apart from other religions is its unlimited appeal to and appreciation for all forms of experience. Experience and experimentation are the origin and end of Hinduism, as Radhakrishnan understand it.

Radhakrishnan argues that a scientific attitude has been the hallmark of Hinduism throughout its history. In a revealing passage, Radhakrishnan explains: "The truths of the ṛṣis are not evolved as the result of logical reasoning or systematic philosophy but are the products of spiritual intuition, dṛṣti or vision. The ṛṣis are not so much the authors of the truths recorded in the Vedas as the seers who were able to discern the eternal truths by raising their life-spirit to the plane of universal spirit. They are the pioneer researchers in the realm of the spirit who saw more in the world than their followers. Their utterances are not based on transitory vision but on a continuous experience of resident life and power. When the Vedas are regarded as the highest authority, all that is meant is that the most exacting of all authorities is the authority of facts" (IVL 89-90).

If the ancient seers are, as Radhakrishnan suggests, "pioneer researchers," the Upaniṣads are the records of their experiments. "The chief sacred scriptures of the Hindus, the Vedas register the intuitions of the perfected souls. They are not so much dogmatic dicta as transcripts from life. They record the spiritual experiences of souls strongly endowed with the sense of reality. They are held to be authoritative on the ground that they express the experiences of the experts in the field of religion" (HVL 17).

Radhakrishnan's understanding of scripture as the scientific records of spiritual insights holds not only for Hinduism, but for all religious creeds. Correctly understood, the various scriptures found in the religions of the world are not an infallible revelation, but scientific hypotheses: "The creeds of religion correspond to theories of science" (IVL 86). Radhakrishnan thus recommends that "intuitions of the human soul... should be studied by the methods which are adopted with such great success in the region of positive science" (IVL 85). The records of religious experience, of integral intuitions, that are the world's scriptures constitute the "facts" of the religious endeavor. So, "just as there can be no geometry without the perception of space, even so there cannot be philosophy of religion without the facts of religion" (IVL 84).

Religious claims, in Radhakrishnan's mind, are there for the testing. They ought not be taken as authoritative in and of themselves, for only integral intuitions validated by the light of reason are the final authority on religious matters. "It is for philosophy of religion to find out whether the convictions of the religious seers fit in with the tested laws and principles of the universe" (IVL 85). "When the prophets reveal in symbols the truths they have discovered, we try to rediscover them for ourselves slowly and patiently" (IVL 202).

The scientific temperament demanded by "Hinduism" lends itself to Radhakrishnan's affirmation of the advaitic Absolute. The plurality of religious claims ought to be taken as "tentative and provisional, not because there is no absolute, but because there is one. The intellectual accounts become barriers to further insights if they get hardened into articles of faith and forget that they are constructed theories of experience" (IVL 199).

For Radhakrishnan, the marginalization of intuition and the abandonment of the experimental attitude in matters of religion has lead Christianity to dogmatic stasis. "It is an unfortunate legacy of the course which Christian theology has followed in Europe that faith has come to connote a mechanical adherence to authority. If we take faith in the proper sense of truth or spiritual conviction, religion is faith or intuition" (HVL 16). The religious cul de sac in which Europe and Christian theology find themselves testifies to their reluctance to embrace the Hindu maxim that "theory, speculations, [and] dogma change from time to time as the facts become better understood" (IVL 90). For the value of religious "facts" can only be assessed "from their adequacy to experience" (IVL 90). Just as the intellect has dominated Western philosophy to the detriment of intuition, so too has Christianity followed suit in its search for a theological touchstone in scripture.

e. Practical Mysticism and Applied Ethics

Radhakrishnan's appeal to intuition underlies his vision for an ethical Hinduism, a Hinduism free from ascetic excesses. The ethical potency of intuition affirms the validity of the world. "Asceticism," Radhakrishnan emphasizes, "is an excess indulged in by those who exaggerate the transcendent aspect of reality." Instead, the rational mystic "does not recognize any antithesis between the secular and the sacred. Nothing is to be rejected; everything is to be raised" (IVL 115).

Radhakrishnan's ethical mystic does not simply see the inherent value of the world and engage in its affairs. Rather, the ethical individual is guided by an intuitive initiative to move the world forward creatively, challenging convention and established patterns of social interaction. For Radhakrishnan, this ethically integrated mode of being presents a positive challenge to moral dogmatism. The positive challenge to moral convention, according to Radhakrishnan, is the creative promotion of social tolerance and accommodation. Just as Radhakrishnan's Hinduism rejects absolute claims to truth and the validity of external authority, so too has Hinduism "developed an attitude of comprehensive charity instead of a fanatic faith in an inflexible creed" (HVL 37).

i. Ethics of Caste

Radhakrishnan affirms that the caste system, correctly understood, is an exemplary case of ethical tolerance and accommodation born out of an intuitive consciousness of reality. "The institution of caste illustrates the spirit of comprehensive synthesis characteristic of the Hindu mind with its faith in the collaboration of races and the co-operation of cultures. Paradoxical as it may seem, the system of caste is the outcome of tolerance and trust" (HVL 93) Based not on the mechanical fatalism of karma, as suggested by Hinduism's critics, but on a recognition of Hinduism's spiritual values and ethical ideals, caste affirms the value of each individual to work out his or her own spiritual realization, a spiritual consciousness Radhakrishnan understands in terms of integral experience. Just as Radhakrishnan sees his ranking of religions as affirming the relative value of each religion in terms of its proximity to Vedanta, the institution of caste is a social recognition that each member of society has the opportunity to experiment with his or her own spiritual consciousness free from dogmatic restraints. In Radhakrishnan's eyes, herein lies the ethical potency and creative genius of integral experience. Caste is the creative innovation of those "whose lives are characterized by an unshakable faith in the supremacy of the spirit, invincible optimism, ethical universalism, and religious toleration" (IVL 126). [For a discussion of the democratic basis of caste in Radhakrishnan's thinking, see Robert Minor, Radhakrishnan: A Religious Biography(1989).]

3. Criticism

There are numerous criticisms that may be raised against Radhakrishnan's philosophy. What follows is not an exhaustive list, but three of the most common criticisms which may be levied against Radhakrishnan.

a. Epistemic Authority

The first is a criticism regarding the locus of epistemic authority. One might ask the question: Does the test for knowledge lie in scripture or in experience? Radhakrishnan's view is that knowledge comes from intuitive experience (anubhava). Radhakrishnan makes this claim on the basis of scripture, namely the Upaniṣads. The Upaniṣads, according to Radhakrishnan, support a monistic ontology. Radhakrishnan makes this claim on the basis that the Upaniṣads are the records of the personal experiences of the ancient sages. Thus, the validity of one's experience is determined by its proximity to that which is recorded in the Upaniṣads. Conversely, the Upaniṣads are authoritative because they are the records of monistic experiences. There is a circularity here. But this circularity is one with which Radhakrishnan himself would likely not only acknowledge, but embrace. After all, Radhakrishnan might argue, intuitive knowledge is non-rational. An intuitive experience of Reality is not contrary to reason but beyond the constraints of logical analysis.

b. Cultural and Religious Constructions

A second criticism of Radhakrishnan's views surrounds his characterizations of the "East" and the "West." Radhakrishnan characterizes the West, as well as Christianity, as inclined to dogmatism, the scientific method whose domain is limited to exploration of the outer natural world, and a reliance upon second-hand knowledge. The East, by contrast, is dominated by an openness to inner experience and spiritual experimentation. The West is rational and logical, while the East is predominantly religious and mystical. As pointed out by numerous scholars working in the areas of post-colonial studies and orientalism, Radhakrishnan's constructions of "West" and "East" (these categories themselves being constructions) accept and perpetuate orientalist and colonialist forms of knowledge constructed during the 18th and 19th centuries. Arguably, these characterizations are "imagined" in the sense that they reflect the philosophical and religious realities of neither "East" nor "West."

c. Selectivity of Evidence

A separate but related criticism that might be levied against Radhakrishnan's views has to do with his theory of religious pluralism and his treatment of the religious traditions with which he deals.

First, Radhakrishnan minimizes the contributions of the monistic philosophers and religious mystics of the West. While Radhakrishnan acknowledges the work of such thinkers as Henri Bergon, Goethe, and a variety of Christian, Jewish, and Muslim mystics, he seems to imply that such approaches to religious and philosophical life in the West are exceptions rather than the rule. In fact, Radhakrishnan goes so far as to suggest that such figures are imbued with the spirit of the East, and specifically Hinduism as he understands it.

Second, while Radhakrishnan readily acknowledges the religious diversity within "Hinduism," his treatment of Western traditions is much less nuanced. In a sense, Radhakrishnan homogenizes and generalizes Western traditions. In his hierarchy of religions (see Section 2c above), one or another form of Hinduism may be located within each of his religious categories (monistic, theistic, incarnational, ancestoral, and natural). By contrast, Radhakrishnan seems to imply that the theistic (second) and the incarnational (third) categories are the domains of Unitarian and Trinitarian Christianity respectively.

4. List of Abbreviations

HVL - The Hindu View of Life (1927)

IP1 - Indian Philosophy: Volume 1 (1923)

IVL - An Idealist View of Life (1929)

MST - My Search for Truth (1937)

5. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources by Radhakrishnan

  • The Ethics of the Vedanta and Its Metaphysical Presuppositions. Madras: The Guardian Press, 1908.
  • "Karma and Freewill" in Modern Review. (Calcutta) Vol. III (May 1908), pp. 424-428.
  • "Indian Philosophy: The Vedas and the Six Systems" in The Madras Christian College Magazine. III (New Series), pp. 22-35.
  • "'Nature' and ‘Convention' in Greek Ethics" in The Calcutta Review, CXXX (January 1910), pp. 9-23.
  • "Egoism and Altruism: The Vedanta Solution" in East and West (Bombay) IX (July 1910), pp. 626-630.
  • "The Relation of Morality to Religion" in The Hindustan Review (September 1910), pp. 292-297.
  • "Morality and Religion in Education" in The Madras Christian College Magazine. X (1910-1911), pp. 233-239.
  • "The Ethics of the Bhagavadgita and Kant" in The International Journal of Ethics. XXI, Number 4 (July 1911), pp. 465-475.
  • Essentials of Psychology. London: Oxford University Press, 1912.
  • "The Ethics of the Vedanta" in The International Journal of Ethics. XXIV, Number 2 (January 1914), pp. 168-183.
  • "The Vedanta Philosophy and the Doctrine of Maya" in The International Journal of Ethics. XXIV, Number 4 (April 1914), pp. 431-451.
  • "A View of India on the War" in Asiatic Review. (London), VI (May 1915), pp. 369-374.
  • Religion and Life, Leaflet No. 15, The Theistic Endeavor Society of Madras. November 1915.
  • "The Vedantic Approach to Reality" in The Monist. XXVI, Number 2 (April 1916), pp. 200-231.
  • "Religion and Life" in The International Journal of Ethics. XXVII, Number 1 (October 1916), pp. 91-106.
  • "Bergson's Idea of God" in The Quest. (London), VII (October 1916), pp. 1-8.
  • "The Philosophy of Rabindranath Tagore – I" in The Quest. (London) VIII, Number 3 (April 1917), pp. 457-477.
  • "The Philosophy of Rabindranath Tagore – II" in The Quest. (London) VIII, Number 4 (July 1917), pp. 592-612.
  • "Vedantamum Mayavadamum in Cittantam" in Siddhantam: Journal of the Saiva Siddhanta Association. V, pp. 159-163.
  • The Philosophy of Rabindranath Tagore. London: Macmillan & Co., 1918.
  • "James Ward's Pluaralistic Theism: I" in The Indian Philosophical Review. II, Number 2 (October 1918), pp. 97-118.
  • "James Ward's Pluaralistic Theism: II" in The Indian Philosophical Review. II, Number 3 (December 1918), pp. 210-232.
  • "Bergson and Absolute Idealism – I" in Mind. (New Series) XXVII (January 1919), pp. 41-53.
  • "Bergson and Absolute Idealism – II" in Mind. (New Series) XXVII (July 1919), pp. 275-296.
  • The Reign of Religion in Contemporary Philosophy. London: Macmillan & Co., 1920.
  • "The Future of Religion" in The Mysore University Magazine. IV, (1920), pp. 148-157.
  • "Review of Bernard Bosanquet's ‘Implication and Linear Inference'" in The Indian Philosophical Review. III, Number 3 (July 1920), p. 301.
  • "The Metaphysics of the Upanisads – I" in The Indian Philosophical Review. III, Number 3, (July 1920), pp. 213-236.
  • The Metaphysics of the Upanisads – II in The Indian Philosophical Review. III, Number 4, (October 1920), pp. 346-362.
  • "Gandhi and Tagore" in The Calcutta Review. (Third Series), I (October 1921), pp. 14-29.
  • "Religion and Philosophy" in The Hibbert Journal. XX, Number 1 (October 1921), pp. 35-45.
  • "Tilak as Scholar" in The Indian Review. XXII (December 1921), pp. 737-739.
  • "Contemporary Philosophy" in The Indian Review. XXIII (July 1922), pp. 440-443.
  • "The Heart of Hinduism" in The Hibbert Journal. XXI, Number 1 (October 1922), pp. 5-19.
  • "The Hindu Dharma" in The International Journal of Ethics. XXXIII, Number 1 (October 1922), pp. 1-22.
  • Indian Philosophy: Volume 1. London: George Allen & Unwin, Ltd., 1923.
  • "Islam and Indian Thought" in The Indian Review. XXIV (Novermber 1923), pp. 53-72.
  • "Religious Unity" in The Mysore University Magazine. VII, pp. 187-198.
  • The Philosophy of the Upanisads. London: George Allen & Unwin, Ltd., 1924.
  • "Hindu Thought and Christian Doctrine" in The Madras Christian College Magazine. (Quarterly Series) (January 1924), pp. 18-34.
  • "The Hindu Idea of God" in The Quest. (London) XV, Number 3 (April 1924), pp. 289-310.
  • "Indian Philosophy: Some Problems" in Mind. (New Series) XXV (April 1926), pp. 154-180.
  • The Hindu View of Life. London: George Allen & Unwim, Ltd., 1927.
  • "The Role of Philosophy in the History of Civilization" in Edgar Shefield Brightman (ed.)Proceedings of the Sixth International Congress of Philosophy. New York: Longmans, Green and Co., 1927. pp. 543-550.
  • "The Doctrine of Maya: Some Problems" in Edgar Shefield Brightman (ed.) Proceedings of the Sixth International Congress of Philosophy. New York: Longmans, Green and Co., 1927. pp. 683-689.
  • Indian Philosophy: Volume 2. London: George Allen & Unwin, Ltd., 1927.
  • "Presidential Address" in Proceedings of the III Indian Philosophical Congress. Calcutta: Calcutta University, 1927. pp. 19-30.
  • "Educational Reform" in The Calcutta Review. (May 1927), pp. 143-154.
  • The Religion We Need. London: Ernest Benn, Ltd., 1928.
  • The Vedanta According to Śaṅkara and Ramanuja. London: George Allen & Unwin, Ltd., 1928.
  • "Indian Philosophy (To the Editor of Mind)" in Mind. (New Series) XXXVII (January 1928), pp. 130-131.
  • Buddhism in Prabuddha Bharata. XXXIII, Number 8 (August 1928), pp. 349-354.
  • "Evolution and Its Implications" in The New Era. I (November 1928), pp. 102-111.
  • Kalki or The Future of Civilization. London: Kegan, Paul, Trench & Co. Ltd., 1929.
  • An Idealist View of Life. London: George Allen & Unwin Ltd., 1929.
  • "Indian Philosophy" in Encyclopedia Britannica. (14th edition) Volume XII, New York, pp. 242-243.
  • Prof. Radhakrishnan's Reply in The Modern Review. XLV, Number 2 (February 1929), pp. 208-213.
  • Prof. Radhakrishnan's Reply in The Modern Review. XLV, Number 3 (March 1929), pp. 321-322.
  • "Review of John Baillie's ‘The Interpretation of Religion'" in The Hibbert Journal. XXVIII, Number 4 (July 1930), 740-742.
  • ""Foreword"" in Abhay Kumer Majumdar, The Sāṃkhya Conception of Personality. Calcutta: Calcutta University Press, 1930. pp. ix-xii.
  • "The Hindu Idea of God" in The Spectator. May 30, 1931 (Number 51370), pp. 851-853.
  • "Intuition and Intellect" in Ramananda Chatterjee (ed.) The Golden Book of Tagore: A Hommage to Rabindranath Tagore from India and the World in Celebration of His Seventieth Birthday. Calcutta: Golden Book Committee, pp. 310-313.
  • ""Foreword"" in Nalini Kanta Brahma, The Philosophy of Hindu Sadhana. London: Kegan, Paul, Trench & Co., pp. ix-x.
  • "Presidential Address" in H.D. Bhattacharyya (ed.) Proceedings of the Eighth Indian Philosophical Congress: The University of Mysore. Calcutta: N.C. Ghosh, pp. v-xvi.
  • "Sarvamukti (Universal Salvation) - A Symposium" in H.D. Bhattacharyya (ed.)Proceedings of the Eighth Indian Philosophical Congress: The University of Mysore. Calcutta: N.C. Ghosh, pp. 314-318.
  • East and West in Religion. London: George Allen & Unwin, Ltd., 1933.
  • "Intellect and Intuition in Sankara's Philosophy" in Triveni. VI, Number 1 (July-August 1933), pp. 8-16.
  • The Teaching of the Buddha: Being the Inaugural Lecture under the Alphina Ratnayaka Trust Delivered by Sir Sarvepalli Radhakrishnan at Columbo, 2nd October, 1933. Columbo: The Public Trust of Ceylon, 1933.
  • "The Teaching of the Buddha by Speech and by Silence" in The Hibbert Journal. XXXII, Number 3 (April 1934), pp. 342-356.
  • ""Foreword"" in Perviz N. Peerozshaw Dubash Hindu Art in its Social Setting. Madras: National Literature Publishing Co. Ltd., 1934. pp. iv-v.
  • Freedom and Culture. Madras: G.A. Natesan & Co., 1936.
  • The Heart of Hindusthan. Madras: G.A. Natesan & Co., 1936.
  • "The Spirit in Man" in Sarvepalli Radhakrishnan and J.H. Muirhead (eds.) Contemporary Indian Philosophy. London: George Allen and Unwin, Ltd., 1936. pp. 257-289.
  • "The Supreme Spiritual Ideal" in A. Douglas Millard (ed.) Faiths and Fellowship: Being the Proceddings of the World Congress of Faiths Held in London, July 3rd-17th, 1936. London: J.M. Watkins, 1936. pp. 422-430.
  • "Spiritual Freedom and the New Education in New Era" in Home and School. XVII (September-October 1936). pp. 233-235.
  • ""Foreword"" in B.L. Atreya The Philosophy of Yoga-Vasistha. Adyar: Theosophical Publishing House, 1936. p. vii.
  • "Progress and Spiritual Values" in Philosophy: The Journal of the British Institute of Philosophy. XII, Number 47 (July 1937), pp. 259-275.
  • "Education and Spiritual Freedom" in Triveni. (New Series) X, Number 3 (September 1937), pp. 9-22.
  • "Hinduism" in G.T Garratt (ed.) The Legacy of India. London: Oxford University Press, 1937. pp. 256-286.
  • "Introduction to the First Edition" in The Cultural Heritage of India. Calcutta: The Ramakrishna Mission Institute of Culture, I, 1937. pp. xxiii-xxxvi.
  • "My Search For Truth" in Vergilius Ferm (ed.) Religion in Transition. London: George Allen & Unwin, Ltd., 1937. pp. 11-59.
  • "The Individual and the Social Order" in Hinduism in E.R. Hughes (ed.) The Individual in East and West. London: Oxford University Press, 1937. pp. 109-152.
  • "The Failure of the Intellectuals" in The Indian Review. XXXVIII (December 1937), pp. 737-739.
  • ""Foreword"" in Saroj Kumar Das A Study of the Vedanta. Calcutta: Calcutta University, 1937. pp. ix-x.
  • Gautama the Buddha. London: Oxford University Press, 1938.
  • "Religion: A Plea for Sanity" in Triveni. (New Series) XI, Number 5 (November 1938), pp. 9-14.
  • "The Renascence of Religion: A Hindu View" in The Renascence of Religion: Being the Proceedings of the Third Meetings of the World Congress of Faiths. London: Arthur Probstain, 1938. pp. 8-18.
  • "Convocation Address" (December 17, 1938) reprinted in Benaras Hindu University News Letter. (Teacher's Day Special Number) 5th September 1993. pp. 9-19.
  • "Letter to Madan Mohan Malaviya" dated 3/12/39 reprinted in Benaras Hindu University News Letter. (Teacher's Day Special Number) 5th September 1994. p. 5.
  • "Letter to Madan Mohan Malaviya" dated 20/8/39 reprinted in Benaras Hindu University News Letter. (Teacher's Day Special Number) 5th September 1993. p. 8.
  • "Letter to Madan Mohan Malaviya" dated 26/11 reprinted in Benaras Hindu University News Letter. (Teacher's Day Special Number) 5th September 1993. pp. 20-21.
  • ""Foreword"" in T.M.P. Mahadevan The Philosophy of Advaita. Madras: Ganesh and Co., 1938.
  • Eastern Religions and Western Thought. London: Oxford University Press, 1939.
  • "Introduction: Gandhi's Religion and Politics" in Sarvepalli Radhakrishnan (ed.) Mahatma Gandhi: Essays and Reflections on His Life and Work. London: George Allen & Unwin, 1939. pp. 13-40.
  • "Foreword" in S.K. George Gandhi's Challenge to Christianity. London: George Allen & Unwin, 1939. pp. 9-10.
  • "Presidential Address" in Proceedings of the 15th Conference, All India Federation of Educational Associations, Lucknow, December 26-31, 1939. Allahabad: Ram Narain Lal, 1939. pp. 100-105.
  • "Hinduism and the West ‘in L.S.S. O'Malley (ed.) Modern India and the West. London: Oxford University Press, 1941. pp. 338-353.
  • "Supreme Values of the Spirit" (Speech on the laying of the foundation-stone to Holdar House, Banaras Hindu University) reprinted in Benaras Hindu University News Letter. (Teacher's Day Special Number) 5th September 1994. pp. 10-14.
  • "Coming Out of Darkness" (Speech delivered on the Silver Jubilee of Benaras Hindu University, January 21, 1942) excerpts reprinted in Benaras Hindu University News Letter. (Teacher's Day Special Number) 5th September 1993. pp. 6-7.
  • "General Preface" in Ganganatha Jha Pūrva-Mīmāṃsā in its Sources. Benaras: Benaras Hindu University, 1942. pp. v-vi.
  • "The Cultural Problem" in A.I.J. Appasamy (ed.) The Cultural Problem (Oxford Pamphlets on Indian Affairs) Number 1. Madras: Oxford University Press, 1942. pp. 41-50.
  • "India's Heritage" in The Proceedings and Transactions of the XII Session of the All India Oriental Conference. Benaras: Benaras University Press, 1943. pp. 1-5.
  • "Silver Jubilee Address" in Annals of the Bhandarkar Oriental Research Institute. XXIV, Parts 1-2 (Monday January 4, 1943), 1943. pp. 1-8.
  • Education, Politics and War. Poona: The International Book Service, 1944.
  • India and China: Lectures Delivered in China in May 1944. Bombay: Hind Kitabs, Ltd., 1944.
  • "Foreword" in Swami Nirvedananda Hinduism at a Glance. Calcutta: Vidyamandira, 1944.
  • "Foreword" in D.S. Sharma Studies in the Renaissance of Hinduism in the Nineteenth and Twentieth Century. Banaras: Banaras Hindu University, 1944. pp. v-vi.
  • Is this Peace? Bombay: Hind Kitabs, Ltd., 1945.
  • Moral Values in Literature in K.R. Srinivasa Iyengar (ed.) Indian Writers in Council: Proceedings of the First All-India Writers Conference (Jaipur 1945). Bombay: International Book House Ltd., 1945. pp. 86-105.
  • "Introduction" in Dilip Kumar Roy Among the Great. Bombay: Nalanda Publication, 1945. pp. 11-18.
  • "Foreword" in Swami Avinasananda Gita Letters. Bombay: Hind Kitabs Ltd., 1945.
  • "Foreword" in R.K. Prabhu and U.R. Rao (eds.) The Mind of Mahatma Gandhi. Bombay: Oxford University Press, 1945. pp. v-vi.
  • "Speech" in P.E.N. News. Number 142 (March 1946), pp. 8-10.
  • "The Voice of India in the Spiritual Crisis of Our Times" in The Hibbert Journal. XLV, Number 4 (July 1946), pp. 295-304.
  • "Bhagavan Sri Ramana: Sustainer of Spiritual Reality" in Golden Jubilee Souvenir. Tiruvannamalai: Sri Ramanasram, 1946. pp. 51-56.
  • "Speech" in General Discussion of the Work of the Prepatory Commission in UNESCO General Conference: First Session. Held at UNESCO House, Paris from 20 November to 10 December, 1946. Paris: UNESCO, 1947. pp. 27-28.
  • Religion and Society. London: George Allen & Unwin Ltd., 1947.
  • "Science and Religion" in K. Bharatha Iyer (ed.) Art and Thought: A Volume In Honour of the Late Dr. Ananda K. Coomaraswamy. London: Luzac & Co., 1947. pp. 180-185.
  • "Speech" in Discussion of the Director-General's Report in Records of the General Conference of the UNESCO. Second Session, Mexico, 1947. Paris: UNESCO, 1948. pp. 58-61.
  • The Bhagavadgita with an Introductory Essay, Sanskrit Text, English Translation and Notes. London: George Allen & Unwin Ltd., 1948.
  • "Mahatma Gandhi" in The Hibbert Journal. XLVI, Number 3 (April 1948), pp. 193-197.
  • "General Statement" in Clara Urquhart (ed.) Last Chance: 11 Questions on Issues Determining Our Destiny Answered by 26 Leaders of Thought in 14 Nations. Boston: Beacon Press, 1948. pp. 46-54.
  • "Hinduism" in Hutchinson's Twentieth Century Encyclopedia. London: Hutchinson, 1948. pp. 522.
  • Great Indians. Bombay: Hind Kitabs Ltd., 1949.
  • Report of the University Education Commission (December 1948-August 1949). New Delhi: Ministry of Education, 1949.
  • Indian Culture in Reflections on Our Age: Lectures Delivered at the Opening Session of UNESCO at Sorbonne University, Paris. New York: Columbia University Press, 1949. pp. 115-133.
  • "Speech" in Discussion of the Director-General's Report in Records of the General Conference of the UNESCO. Third Session, Beruit, 1948. Paris: UNESCO, 1949. pp. 56-59.
  • "Speech" in Presentation by the Chairman of the Executive Board of the Director-General's Report on the Activities of the Organization during 1949 in Records of the General Conference of the UNESCO. Fourth Session, Paris, 1949. Paris: UNESCO, 1949. pp. 44-45.
  • "Speech" in Discussion of the Director-General's Report in Records of the General Conference of the UNESCO. Fourth Session, Paris, 1949. Paris: UNESCO, 1949. pp. 58-60.
  • "Speech" in Consideration of the Report of the Official and External Relations Commission on UNESCO's Work in Germany in Records of the General Conference of the UNESCO. Fourth Session, Paris, 1949. Paris: UNESCO, 1949. pp. 194-195.
  • "Goethe" in Goethe: UNESCO's Hommage on the Occassion of the Two Hundredth Anniversary of His Birth. Paris: UNESCO, 1949. pp. 101-108.
  • Clean Advocate of Great Ideals in Nehru Abhinandan Granth: A Birthday Book. New Delhi: Nehru Abhinandan Committee, 1949. pp. 93-96.
  • The Dhammapada. London: Oxford University Press, 1950.
  • "Speech" in Discussion of the Second Report of the Credentials Committee in Records of the General Conference of the UNESCO. Fifth Session, Florence, 1950. Paris: UNESCO, 1950. pp. 178-180.
  • UNESCO and World Revolution in New Republic. July 10, 1950. pp. 15-16.
  • "Foreword" in R.R. Diwarkar The Upaniṣads in Story and Dialogue. Bombay: Hind Kitabs Ltd., 1950. pp. v-vi.
  • "Religion and World Unity" in The Hibbert Journal. XLIX (April 1951), pp. 218-225.
  • The Nature of Man in Barbara Waylen (ed.) Creators of the Modern Spirit: Towards a Philosophy of Faith. New York: Macmillan Co., 1951. pp. 64-66.
  • "The Religion of the Spirit and the World's Need: Fragments of a Confession" in Paul A. Schilpp (ed.) The Philosophy of Sarvepalli Radhakrishnan. New York: Tudor Publishing Co., 1952. pp. 5-82.
  • "Reply to Critics" in Paul A. Schilpp (ed.) The Philosophy of Sarvepalli Radhakrishnan. New York: Tudor Publishing Co., 1952. pp. 789-842.
  • "Vedanta - The Advaita School" in S. Radhakrishnan (ed.) History of Philosophy Eastern and Western: Volume 1. New York: Barnes and Noble, 1952. pp. 272-286.
  • "Inaugural Address in Report of the Proceedings, 1952." International Congress on Planned Parenthood. London: Family Planning, 1952. pp. 10-13.
  • "Religion and the World Crisis" in Christopher Isherwood (ed.) Vedanta for Modern Man. London: George Allen & Unwin Ltd., 1952. pp. 338-341.
  • "Foreword" in D.F.A. Bode and P. Nanavutty Songs of Zarathustra: The Gathas. London: George Allen & Unwin Ltd., 1952. p. 9.
  • "Concluding Survey" in S. Radhakrishnan (ed.) History of Philosophy Eastern and Western: Volume 2. New York: Barnes and Noble, 1953. pp. 439-448.
  • The Principal Upaniṣads. London: George Allen & Unwin Ltd., 1953.
  • Convocation Address on the occasion on the Silver Jubilee of the Andhra University, Waltair, 1953. Copy available at Andhra University Library Special Collections Section.
  • Comment in Visitor's Book: Voorhees College, Vellore. Dated: 17.1.53. Voohees College Archives, Vellore, Tamil Nadu.
  • "Preface" in Sarvepalli Radhakrishnan, A.C. Ewing, Paul Arthur Schilpp, et al. (eds.) A.R. Wadia: Essays in Philosophy Presented in His Honour. (nd/np), 1954.
  • Recovery of Faith. New York: Harper and Brothers, 1955.
  • Bhoodan - The Economic Agrarian Revolution (Speech delivered at the Sixth Sarvodaya Sammelan at Bodh-Gaya on 19/4/1954) reprinted in Bhoodan (nd/np), 1955. pp. 1-5. Available in the Tamil Nadu State Archives, Chennai, general reference.
  • Occasional Speeches and Writings: October 1952-January 1956. New Delhi: Ministry of Information and Broadcasting, Government of India, 1956, 1960.
  • East and West: Some Reflections. London: George Allen & Unwin Ltd., 1956.
  • Occasional Speeches and Writings (Second Series): February 1956-February 1957. New Delhi: Ministry of Information and Broadcasting, Government of India, 1957.
  • A Sourcebook in Indian Philosophy. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1957. (ed. with Charles A. Moore)
  • The Brahma Sutra: The Philosophy of Spiritual Life. London: George Allen & Unwin Ltd., 1959.
  • "Prefatory Remarks" in S. Radhakrishnan and P.T. Raju (eds.) The Concept of Man. London: George Allen & Unwin Ltd., 1960. pp. 9-13.
  • Note on Vice-Presidential Letterhead (No. 26/1303) to the Principal of Voorhees College located in Visitor's Book: Voorhees College, Vellore. Dated: 23rd June, 1960. Voorhees College Archives, Vellore, Tamil Nadu.
  • "Foreword" in Ramakrishnan Bajaj The Young Russia. Bombay: Popular Book Depot, 1960.
  • Fellowship of the Spirit. Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1961.
  • Two Addresses Delivered in Germany: October 1961. New Delhi: Max Muller Bhavan, 1961.
  • "Most Dear to All the Muses" in A Centenary Volume: Rabindranath Tagore: 1861-1961. New Delhi: Sahitya Akademi, 1961. pp. xvii-xxv.
  • "Tagore the Philosopher" in Indo-Asian Culture. XI (January 1962), pp. 283-295.
  • "Tagore and the Realization of God" in Indo Asia. IVV (April 1962), pp. 150-157.
  • Occasional Speeches and Writings (Third Series): July 1959-May 1962. New Delhi: Ministry of Information and Broadcasting, Government of India, 1963.
  • "Swami Vivekananda - A Spokesman of the Divine Logos" in Vedanta Kesari. L, Number 4 (August 1963), pp. 158-163.
  • President Radhakrishnan's Speeches and Writings: May 1962-May1964. New Delhi: Ministry of Information and Broadcasting, Government of India, 1965.
  • On Nehru. New Delhi: Ministry of Information and Broadcasting, Government of India, 1965.
  • President Radhakrishnan's Speeches and Writings (Second Series): May 1964-May1967. New Delhi: Ministry of Information and Broadcasting, Government of India, 1967.
  • Religion in a Changing World. London: George Allen & Unwin Ltd., 1967.
  • "The Indian Approach to the Religious Problem" in Charles A. Moore (ed.) The Indian Mind. Honolulu: East-West Center Press, 1967. pp. 173-182.
  • Religion and Culture. Delhi: Hind Pocket Books, 1968.
  • "Introduction" in Sarvepalli Radhakrishnan (ed.) Mahatma Gandhi: 100 Years. New Delhi: Gandhi Peace Foundation, 1968. pp. 1-10.
  • Our Heritage. Delhi: Hind Pocket Books, 1973.
  • The Creative Life. New Delhi: Orient Paperbacks, 1975.
  • "Are We Planning for Life?" in Mira. XXXIII, Numbers 8-9 (July-August 1975), pp. 179-180 and 206.

b. Selected Secondary Sources

  • Arapura, J.G. Radhakrishnan and Integral Experience: The Philosophy and World Vision of Sarvepalli Radhakrishnan. Calcutta: Asia Publishing House, 1966.
  • Atreya, J.P. (ed.) Dr. S. Radhakrishnan: Sovenir Volume. Moradabad: Darshana International, 1964.
  • Baird, Robert D. (ed.) Religion in Modern India. New Delhi: Manohar, 1981.
  • Banerji, Anjan Kumar (ed.) Sarvepalli Radhakrishnan: A Centenary Tribute. Varanasi, 1991-1992.
  • Bishop, Donald H. (ed.) Thinkers of the Indian Renaissance. New Delhi: Wiley Eastern Limited, 1982.
  • Braue, Donald A. Maya in Radhakrishnan's Thought: Six Meanings Other than Illusion. Columbia: South Asia Books, 1985.
  • Brookman, David M. Sarvepalli Radhakrishnan in the Commentarial Tradition of India. Bhubaneswara, 1990.
  • Gopal, Sarvepalli. Radhakrishnan: A Biography. Delhi: Oxford University Press, 1989.
  • Harris, Ishwar C. Radhakrishnan: The Profile of a Universalist. Columbia: South Asia Books, 1982.
  • Hawley, Michael. A Biography of Experience: Radhakrishnan, Apologetics and Orientalism. (Unpublished Ph.D. Dissertation) University of Calgary, 2002.
  • Hawley, Michael. "The Making of a Mahatma: Radhakrishnan's Critique of Gandhi" inStudies in Religion. 32/1-2 (2003) 135-148.
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Author Informaiton

Michael Hawley
Mount Royal College

Cicero: Academic Skepticism

cicero-02Cicero (106 to 43 B.C.E.) adopted the philosophical view of the Academic skeptics as a young man sometime in the 80's. In 89/8, Philo of Larissa, the head of Plato's Academy, fled from Athens to Rome for political reasons. While at Rome, Cicero attended Philo’s public lectures and began to study philosophy with him. Cicero also studied with the most prominent representatives of other Hellenistic philosophical schools: Posidonius (a Stoic), Zeno of Citium and Phaedrus (Epicureans), and Cratippus (a Peripatetic). Although the Academy probably ceased to exist as an institution after Philo’s death in 84, Cicero continued to champion its methodology in his philosophical dialogues.

The Academic position appealed to Cicero for a variety of reasons (Section 1). The Academics argued on both sides of every issue in order to undermine the dogmatic confidence of their interlocutors. Cicero's teacher Philo also applied this method in order to determine which position enjoyed the most rational support. Given his rhetorical and forensic skills, Cicero likely found this method attractive. It was also ideal for his project of inducing the ruling class Romans to take up the practice of philosophy. Rather than present his personal views, Cicero laid out in dialogue form the strongest arguments he could mine from other philosophical texts. The idea was to encourage the reader to come to his own conclusion, but even more importantly, to adopt the Academic method of inquiry. Perhaps the most attractive feature of Academic philosophy for Cicero was the intellectual freedom guaranteed by the method. The Academic is bound to no particular doctrine as an Academic. He is only bound to accept the verdict of his best rational assessment of the arguments pro and con.

Cicero asserts that the reasons for his Academic allegiance are set out fully in his Academica (De Natura Deorum 1.11). Although these Academic books are fragmentary, they nonetheless provide a detailed account of the dispute between the Academics and Stoics on the possibility of knowledge (Sections 2 and 3) along with Philo's explanation for how we can manage quite well without knowledge (Section 4).

Table of Contents

  1. The Skeptical Academy and its Appeal to Cicero
  2. Arguments For and Against Stoic Epistemology in the Academica
  3. Indirect Arguments in Support of Stoic Epistemology in the Academica
  4. The Positive Fallibilism of the Philonian Academy
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. Latin Texts and Translations
    2. Select Bibliography of Secondary Literature

1. The Skeptical Academy and its Appeal to Cicero

There were some important variations among the Academics during the Academy’s skeptical period (c. 268/7 B.C.E to 1st century B.C.E.), but there is also a unifying feature. They all focused squarely, if not exclusively, on refutation. Inspired by Socrates (as he appears in some of Plato’s dialogues), they sought to combat the overly confident attitude of the dogmatists. Since the Stoics were the most influential dogmatists of the time, the skeptical Academics devoted much of their energy to combating them in particular. (Dogmatism in the Hellenistic period is simply a matter of positively affirming that one knows the truth of some systematically related philosophical propositions—it need not have the pejorative connotation currently associated with it.)

In order to refute their opponents, the Academics argued dialectically. Rather than assert a position themselves, they would reveal to the interlocutor that his beliefs are mutually inconsistent and thus that he is not able to justify his claim to knowledge. For example, suppose I claim to know that justice is whatever the strong say it is. Then, in response to a skeptic’s questioning, I am led on the basis of my own premises to conclude that justice is not whatever the strong say it is. It follows that I did not really know what I claimed to know. The operative assumption is that if I had known what justice is, I would have been able to show why my belief is true. If I contradict myself or run out of plausible reasons, then I do not know what justice is after all—even if my belief turns out to be true, I do not know why it is true.

Later Academics also began arguing on both sides of every issue, pro and con. Some apparently sought to show that nothing whatsoever could be known about the issue in question. To accomplish this end, they showed others that there are equally strong arguments for and against, and thus no compelling reason to accept any position. Others employed the same method in order to discover which side of an issue could be most plausibly defended. But all of the Academics agreed that the Stoics had failed to adequately defend their epistemology; that is, they had not shown that knowledge is possible (much more on this below in sections 2 and 3).

Cicero found the later Academic position appealing for a variety of reasons. The method of arguing pro and con was a natural fit with his tremendous oratorical and forensic skill. As a lawyer and orator he was pleased by the Academy’s insistence on teaching rhetoric along with philosophy on the grounds that the two disciplines were mutually supportive. He also found the position ideally suited to his philosophical project of inspiring the Roman ruling class to take up the practice of philosophy. In his dialogues he employs the Academic method with the intention of encouraging his readers to think for themselves rather than to rely on authority.

He was perhaps most attracted by the Academics’ intellectual freedom. In his earliest statement of Academic allegiance, Cicero remarks that he will gladly change his opinion if someone points out his error. For it is not shameful to have insufficiently understood something. It is shameful, however, to have persevered foolishly and for a long time with insufficient understanding. The reason for this is that insufficient understanding is due to the common weakness of mankind. It is, to some extent inevitable, or at least excusable. Foolish perseverance, however, can be avoided, and hence is shameful and blameworthy. (De Inventione 2.9) Cicero describes such perseverance as the stubborn adherence to one’s position because he has come to feel some affection for it. The Academic, by contrast, is supposed to have no extra-rational motives in defending his view or in persevering, when or if he does.

Part of the rationale for this way of proceeding is that we cannot fully appreciate the relative strengths and weaknesses of the available philosophical positions unless we have thoroughly explored what can be said for and against them. To align oneself to a philosophical position prior to this is premature. As we start out we lack the knowledge or wisdom we seek, and thus we are not in a position to adequately judge which system or which philosopher to follow. Once one undertakes the Academic project, he or she may find, as Cicero did, that one lifetime is not sufficient for completing the project and taking a final stand.

This freedom to change one’s position in accordance with a new assessment of the arguments may appear to dispense with any concern for consistency. Suppose for example that I no longer believe that the arguments in favor of going to war with Carthage are compelling. While I previously believed Rome was justified in going to war, I now believe the opposite. As an Academic I am free to change my position as often as I like. I am not bound by any doctrinal constraints due to my philosophical allegiance. And I am not bound by what I formerly believed. Remaining consistent with my former beliefs is never as important as accepting the verdict of my current assessment of the arguments.

Academic freedom is not an end in itself however; it is a means to arriving at the most rationally defensible position. This is why Cicero characterizes the Academic’s method as aimed at drawing out and articulating that view which can be maintained most consistently (Academica 2.9) and as aimed at revealing what is true or at least the closest approximation to the truth (Academica 2.7, 2.65-66, De Officiis 2.8, Tusculan Disputations 1.8). The consistency sought is an accord with the rational evidence and not with one's previous beliefs.

Cicero frequently singles out this freedom as the most definitive and attractive feature of the Academics' philosophical practice (for example, De Legibus 1.36, Academica 2.134, Tusculan Disputations 4.83, 5.33, 5.82, De Officiis 2.7, 3.20). They alone are free to accept whatever strikes them as most plausible at that moment (see Section 4 below for more on Academic probabilism).

2. Arguments For and Against Stoic Epistemology in the Academica

During his final encyclopedic burst of dialogues (46-44 B.C.), Cicero wrote his epistemological work, the Academica. The original version contained two books named after the principal interlocutor in each, Catulus and Lucullus. The latter of the two is extant, and generally referred to as Ac. 2 or Lucullus (= Luc.). Cicero revised these original two books, dividing them into four, and replaced Lucullus with Varro as principal interlocutor throughout. Only about the first fourth of the revised version is extant. It is generally referred to as Ac. 1.

In these books Cicero presents arguments for and against the Stoic theory of knowledge as well as the Academics' own positive, fallibilistic alternative. It should be noted that ethics and epistemology are inextricably connected in the Academic books. Cicero remarks on several occasions that what they are investigating is the sage—that is, an ideal of the perfectly wise human being. Ultimately, the question about the possibility of knowledge on the Stoic account, and in Hellenistic philosophy in general, is a question about the possibility of wisdom. The Hellenistic philosophers followed Plato’s Socrates in taking their primary task to be the discovery of the best human life.

In order to meet this challenge, Zeno of Citium, the founder of Stoicism, developed an account of how the knowledge that Socrates sought—that is, the knowledge that guides one in living the best possible human life—could in fact be attained. That it could be attained he established on the grounds that the universe is providentially arranged. From the providential arrangement it follows that human beings must be equipped to satisfy their desire for knowledge, for Nature would not have acted so capriciously as to give us such an important desire without also providing the means to fulfill it.

If one developed his natural abilities in accordance with Nature he would eventually learn to infallibly distinguish what is true from what is false, at least with regard to matters pertaining to happiness. The sage is not omniscient, but he is infallible. His knowledge guarantees that he will always live in accordance with nature, which is identical to being virtuous and happy.

All of the sage’s beliefs are true, and grasped in such a way that no experience and no argument is able to dislodge him from his conviction. This irrefutability depends crucially on the fact that all of the sage’s beliefs are true and firmly grasped as such. If he were to hold even one false belief he might be persuaded to rely on it in abandoning true beliefs. So we can see that the sage’s knowledge is systematic in that each of his true beliefs is supported by the others.

The foundation of this account of knowledge is a type of impression about which we cannot be mistaken. This type of impression provides us with a criterion of truth, that is, a measuring stick one can use to determine what is and what is not the case. If the Academics could succeed in showing that there are no such impressions, they would effectively undermine the possibility of attaining the knowledge built upon them.

Thus, the central issue in Ac. 2 is whether or not an impression can be apprehended or grasped in such a way as to guarantee its truth. Zeno described such an impression as cognitive, or mentally graspable (katalêpton), and defined it as one that

(1) comes from what is the case, that is, some existent state of affairs
(2) accurately conveys all the relevant features of what it comes from, and
(3) cannot be exactly like an impression that comes from what is not the case (Ac. 2.77, cp. Sextus’ account at Adversus Mathematikos [= M] 7.248).

Katalêpsis occurs when one assents to a cognitive impression, thereby firmly grasping its truth. So whenever one assents to a cognitive impression one necessarily forms a true belief.

The pressing question is whether one can learn to distinguish cognitive from non-cognitive impressions. It seems that one can never know whether (1) and (2) have been satisfied except by inspecting the perceptual content of the impression. If so, this opens the way for the Academics’ main objection. (It should be noted that the Stoics did not think all cognitive impressions are perceptual. We may have cognitive impressions of evaluative states of affairs—for example that it is good for us to help our friend. However most of the evidence regarding the possibility of such impressions is limited to perceptual cases, and so the following discussion will be similarly limited.)

The Academics demanded that the Stoics produce an instance of this cognitive grasping that is immune to skeptical counterexamples, that is, immune to scenarios in which a true impression provides the same sensory evidence as its false imitator. Apparently there is a plentiful supply of such counterexamples, and the Academics spent a great deal of effort developing them. (Ac. 2.42) One type illustrates cases of misidentification: for example, identical twins, eggs, statues, or imprints in wax made by the same ring. (Ac. 2.84-87) Another type involves cases of illusion, dreams and madness. (Ac. 2.88-91)

So it seems that any example of an allegedly cognitive impression offered by the Stoics can be countered by the Academics’ doppelganger or a scenario in which some mental defect and not the object is responsible for the perceptual content of the impression. In either case, the Academics challenge the third characteristic above of cognitive impressions. This challenge is evident in Cicero’s report. (Ac. 2.83, cf. 2.40) The Academics agree with the Stoics that some impressions are true and some are false, and that false impressions are never cognitive. They also agree that if there were no differences between two impressions then these impressions must either both be cognitive or both fail to be cognitive, that is, either the perceptual content of both guarantee their truth or fails to guarantee their truth. In other words, if there were no differences between the two impressions it cannot be the case that one is cognitive and the other is not. The crucial premise, and the crux of the debate, is the Academics' claim, contrary to (3) above, that

(4) for every true impression there may exist a false one that is identical (that is, qualitatively, not numerically).

If we grant (4), then there can be no impression whose perceptual content guarantees its truth; that is, there can be no cognitive impressions. Imagine that you have received an exceedingly clear and distinct impression of an orange. No matter how much you seek to corroborate the truth of this impression, or acquire an even clearer and more distinct impression, it may still turn out to be false. Based on the way it appears, you can never know whether it is a true impression or a false one that is qualitatively identical to the true one. The possibility of error inevitably enters if we must recognize an impression as cognitive for it to play its intended epistemic role.

In response to (4), the Stoics insisted that no two impressions can be identical (Ac. 2.50). So even though two impressions may seem identical, there will still be distinguishable features. In these sorts of cases we must sharpen our skills and refrain from assenting in the meantime (Ac. 2.56-57). But Cicero replies that it makes no difference whether the impressions are strictly identical or only indistinguishable to us (Ac. 2.85). The issue, as he understands it, is whether we are ever actually in a position to accurately identify an impression as cognitive on the basis of its perceptual content.

This interpretation may be unfair to the Stoics however. At one point Lucullus, the spokesman for the Stoics in the Academica, compares assenting to cognitive impressions to the sinking of a scale's balance when weight is put on it. The mind necessarily yields and cannot refrain from giving its approval to what is perspicuous. (Ac. 2.38) Sextus also attributes this view to later Stoics: when the cognitive impression lacks any obstacles it lays hold of us by the hair and practically drags us to assent. (M 7.257) In the end, assent must still be voluntary. But what these passages suggest is some sort of natural fit between cognitive impressions and our rational faculty such that cognitive impressions are, at least potentially, compelling in a way that false impressions cannot be. According to this view, cognitive impressions affect the properly trained mind in a way that is quite different from the way false impressions affect the same mind. If there is this natural fit between cognitive impressions and our rational faculty, then perhaps it is possible after all to acquire the necessary level of discernment to guarantee that one will only assent to cognitive impressions.

Even so, Cicero was apparently satisfied that the Stoics had not succeeded in showing that cognitive impressions provide us with a criterion of truth in practice. He was more convinced by the seemingly limitless supply of false impressions that we cannot currently distinguish from true ones than by the remote possibility of developing our powers of discernment to overcome such possible deceptions.

3. Indirect Arguments in Support of Stoic Epistemology in the Academica

Lucullus also presents some indirect arguments. He assumes the truth of Cicero's Academic position (akatalêpsia, that is, the denial of the possibility of katalêpsis) and derives unacceptable consequences. There are two types of such argument: first that akatalêpsia is self-refuting or inconsistent (Ac. 2.33, 44, 58, cf. also 111), and second that akatalêpsia removes the possibility of certain sorts of successful action, especially virtuous action (Ac. 2.19-27, 32-39). These are versions of the two most often repeated arguments against virtually every ancient skeptic. In this context, however, they are specifically tailored as responses to the rejection of the Stoic criterion.

First, consider the charge that akatalêpsia is self-refuting. Lucullus remarks that the Academics' crucial premise (4) tells us that there are (or at least may be) no differences between any given true impression and a false one. And yet the Academics also claim that some impressions are true and some are false, and this implies that there is some difference between them. (Ac. 2.44) Thus in rejecting katalêpsis, the Academics inconsistently argue that there is and there is not a difference between any given true impression and a false one.

There is an easy rejoinder available. Cicero need only claim that there are no perceptual differences between any given true impression and a false one. This is consistent with saying that there are causal differences, specifically that true impressions come from what is the case and false ones do not. Cicero does not deny that truth exists, but rather that we can grasp it with certainty. (Ac. 2.111) So the problem lies not with the world, but rather with our inability to develop our powers of discernment to the level required by the Stoic theory. No matter how much practice we may have at distinguishing eggs, there may always be a pair of eggs whose similarities exceed our ability.

But Lucullus’ objection is not merely that akatalêpsia entails the impossibility of correctly identifying which of my impressions are true. His objection also includes the claim that akatalêpsia entails the eradication of any adequate conception of truth. (Ac. 2.33) If we have no adequate conception of truth, however, we cannot consistently assert that some impressions are true and some are false. In other words, we should not accept that there is a real distinction between truth and falsity, right and wrong, or any other pair, unless we are confident that our corresponding conceptions of each accurately reveal this distinction. Granting this point, the difficulty for the Stoics lies in explaining why akatalêpsia entails the eradication of any adequate conception of truth in the first place.

Unfortunately, Lucullus does not elaborate on this point. But the explanation must have something to do with the Stoic view of oikeiôsis, the providential process by which Nature guides the moral and intellectual development of all human beings. In sketching the Stoic view of oikeiôsis, we will also arrive at the second sort of objection mentioned above, namely that akatalêpsia removes the possibility of certain sorts of successful action, especially virtuous action.

The Stoics believe that Nature implants in each of us a love of ourselves that is expressed in our primary and earliest drive towards self-preservation. We are naturally disposed to choose what is in accordance with our nature and reject what is opposed or harmful to it. As a result of this innate tendency, we all inevitably develop accurate conceptions (prolêpseis) of what is helpful and what is harmful with respect to self-preservation. This explains, among other things, the instinctive drive of newborns to nurse: the breast is perceived as beneficial.

These naturally developed conceptions must be veridical in keeping with the providence of nature. If they were misleading it would threaten our existence as a species, and it would be impossible to develop such faulty conceptions further into the organized bodies of knowledge exhibited in skillful activity. Nature does not guarantee that we will develop our naturally acquired conceptions into systematic bodies of knowledge and ultimately into virtuous dispositions; neither does Nature guarantee that all acorns will grow into magnificent oaks. But the raw material is provided in both cases.

Assenting to cognitive impressions is essential to the process by which we develop our naturally developed conceptions (prolêpseis) into the more precise conceptions (ennoiai) that regulate our rational judgments. For example, in De Finibus 3, Cicero's Stoic spokesman Cato describes the process by which our natural disposition towards self-preservation is transformed into a true conception of the good. Our drive for self-preservation leads us to accurate conceptions of what is valuable or beneficial. Then, if we reason correctly about the nature of this value, we gradually discern what is genuinely valuable, the good itself. (De Finibus 3.16 ff.) But again it would not be possible to arrive at a true conception of the good if the raw material were somehow misleading.

Lucullus remarks that the mind "seizes some impressions [presumably cognitive ones] in order to make immediate use of them, others, which are the source of memory, it stores away so to speak, while all the rest it arranges by their likenesses, and thereby conceptions of things are produced…" (Ac. 2.30, tr. Long and Sedley [= LS] 40N) So we arrive at our conceptions in general by performing mental operations on sensory experience. (cf. Diogenes Laertius 7.53) If we cannot rely on the accuracy of sensory experience, that is if we deny the possibility of katalêpsis, then it will be impossible to form an accurate conception of truth, or anything else. This in turn undermines our ability to distinguish the true from the false in general.

Cognitive impressions are thus part of a natural fit between the world and our rational faculties—they indicate a basic or immediate way in which the world is intelligible to us. By denying the existence of cognitive impressions, Lucullus claims the Academics obliterate this crucial link and render the world ultimately unintelligible. They "tear out the very tools or equipment of life, or rather they actually ruin the foundations of the whole of life and rob the living being itself of the mind which gives it life…" (Ac. 2.31, tr. LS 40N) And he asks, if the conceptions that we form on the basis of our experience "were false or imprinted by the kind of impressions which were indiscernible from false ones, how on earth could we make use of them?" (Ac. 2.22, tr. LS 40M, cf. Ac. 2.19-20) Lucullus must mean "how could we successfully make use of them?"—otherwise, we could simply say "poorly and unreliably." His question presupposes the apparent success we have had in organizing sensory experience into the systematic bodies of knowledge that are employed in skillful activities. To account for this success he thinks we must acknowledge that some impressions are cognitive.

The denial of katalêpsis also eliminates the possibility of virtue or wisdom. If we cannot form an accurate conception of the good, then we can never be sure that any of our particular actions are in fact good. Personifying wisdom, Lucullus remarks that she cannot possibly be wisdom if she is doubtful and in ignorance regarding the ultimate good which provides the measure against which we evaluate everything. (Ac. 2.24) For example, suppose I assent to the proposition that it is good for me to teach my students about skepticism. The Stoics believe that if my conception of the good is incorrect, or even if I do not know whether it is correct, the resulting action is not virtuous. It may be the right thing to do, but virtue requires that I know it is right, and that my conviction is unshakeable by any argument. Katalêpsis provides the basis for such certainty. The denial of katalêpsis thus removes the possibility of virtue.

The most obvious weakness of these objections is the extent to which they presuppose controversial elements of the Stoic system. Unless the skeptical opponent accepts these elements, the objections have no force. But Cicero does respond to these objections, perhaps because he accepts much of the Stoic system, though in the provisional way characteristic of an Academic. In his defense of the Academic position he shows how successful and skillful action and even virtue are possible without katalêpsis.

4. The Positive Fallibilism of the Philonian Academy

The development of a positive alternative to Stoic katalêpsis is generally thought to be the result of a misinterpretation of the earlier Academics' more radical skepticism, especially Carneades' skepticism. The radical variety makes no provisions for acquiring beliefs; having successfully refuted every available (if not possible) position, the skeptic’s only option is to suspend judgment and believe nothing. The moderate variety, by contrast, aims at acquiring the most rationally defensible position with the full awareness of one’s fallibility.

Cicero insists that Academics do not deny the existence of true impressions; they deny only the possibility of an infallible grasp of them. He offers no explicit defense for the claim that true impressions exist, but he does recognize the existence of technical expertise; the general accuracy of our impressions would then provide the best explanation for this fact. Thus far he is in agreement with Lucullus: there could be no technical expertise if there were absolutely no distinction between true and false impressions. Technical expertise seems to presuppose that most of the impressions we rely on are in fact true.

Such reliability, however, is completely independent of our ability to infallibly differentiate true from false. As long as we make a responsible and cautious use of our impressions, always allowing for the possibility of error, the occasional deception is no serious cause for alarm.

In response to the Stoic objections that akatalêpsia would lead to inaction, the Academics did suggest that we may get along very well by relying on what appears to be subjectively plausible: Arcesilaus refers to this as what is reasonable (to eulogon), and Carneades as what is plausible (to pithanon). Cicero translates these Greek terms with one of his most important philosophical coinages, probabilitas. Regardless of what his predecessors intended by their skeptical alternatives, Cicero clearly intends that probabilitas is somehow like the truth. He frequently uses probabile and veri simile interchangeably (Ac. 2.7-9, 32, 99, Tusculan Disputations 1.17, 2.5).

Furthermore, he acknowledges that probabilitas is useful both “in the conduct of life and in philosophical investigation and discussion" (Ac. 2.32). So it seems that Cicero is not concerned exclusively with explaining relatively mundane successes like our ability to navigate, or even the more noteworthy successes of science, but also the possibility of making progress philosophically. Indeed, he maintains, both in the Academic books and elsewhere, that virtue is possible without Stoic katalêpsis. This is evident in the character of the "Academic sage."

The Academic sage "is not afraid lest he may appear to throw everything into confusion and make everything uncertain. For if a question be put to him about duty or about a number of other matters in which practice has made him an expert, he would not reply in the same way as he would if questioned as to whether the number of stars is even or odd, and say that he did not know; for in things uncertain there is nothing probable, but in things where there is probability the wise man will not be at a loss either what to do or what to answer" (Ac. 2.110, tr. by H. Rackham). Guided solely by probabilitas, the sage will plan out his entire life (Ac. 2.99).

Cicero is much less forthcoming with regard to the details of how the sage employs probabilitas in adjudicating competing philosophical claims. But that the sage does employ probabilitas in this way is evident from the fact that he accepts the denial of the possibility of katalêpsis as probable. (Ac. 2.110) Such a decision indicates that the sage has weighed both sides of the debate and arrived at his probable judgment as a result.

It is likely that Cicero is following Philo's adaptation of Carneades' account of how we should test our sensory impressions when in doubt. (This is most extensively reported by Sextus Empiricus, M 7.166-189, see also Ac. 2.78). In matters of relatively little importance, or when we don't have time for a more thorough examination we rely on whatever seems immediately plausible. Even though unexamined, such impressions may strike us with varying degrees of force or vividness. But since every individual impression is accompanied by a host of other related impressions, we should examine these as well, time permitting. When none of these concurrent impressions seem false, or inconsistent with the impression in question, our belief is greater. In matters of the greatest importance, especially those pertaining to our happiness, we should go a step further and examine each of the concurrent impressions individually, cross-questioning each of them on the testimony of the others. (M 7.184)

Impressions that survive this scrutiny are most credible. But the degrees of credibility have no upper limit since cross-questioning may proceed indefinitely. What the higher levels of scrutiny have in common is that they are aimed primarily at disconfirmation (M 7.189). In the end, what reveals itself as most credible is what has survived the most extensive attempts at "refutation."

Given that Cicero sees himself as engaged in the same philosophical practice as Carneades, it is likely that disconfirmation plays the same central role in the philosophical application of probabilitas as in the empirical application of Carneades’ criterion. So to employ this fallible criterion in philosophical investigation would require a serious and sustained effort to refute the view in question. If it survives such critical scrutiny, it will appear to be like the truth. Since we are dealing with degrees of justification, approximation to the truth most likely refers to the extent to which the view in question has been rationally defended. The further assumption underlying this is that the truth cannot be refuted. Surviving serious attempts at refutation would then provide inductive evidence of the truth of that view, and the more it survives the more it will appear to be like the truth.

Unlike the empirical cases, philosophical issues typically do not force a judgment. We may reflect indefinitely on whether justice is whatever the strong say it is whereas life-and-death, fight-or-flight, judgments cannot wait. This open-endedness is reflected in Cicero's own consideration of the dispute between the Stoics and Peripatetics on the sufficiency of virtue for a happy [eudaimôn] life. Sometimes he was swayed by the Stoics' position that virtue can guarantee a happy life with or without external goods like health and wealth. And sometimes he was swayed by the Peripatetic view that virtue requires at least some of those external goods to secure a happy life. The fact that Cicero continued to the end of his life to struggle with this issue does not mean that he failed as an Academic. Arriving once and for all at the philosophical view that can be most consistently maintained is not required; continuing to search for it is.

5. References and Further Reading

a. Latin Texts and Translations

  • Brittain, C., tr. 2006. Cicero: On Academic Scepticism, Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing.
  • Long and Sedley, tr. 1987. The Hellenistic Philosophers, Volumes 1 and 2, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
    • Long and Sedley provide translations of and commentary on a good portion of the Academica. Their volumes are indispensable to the study of Hellenistic philosophy in general, and the commentary on the selections from the Academica are extremely helpful.
  • Rackham, H., tr. 1933/1994. Cicero: De Natura Deorum, Academica, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
    • This volume in the Loeb Classical Library contains the Latin text with English translation on facing pages. It is currently the only English translation available of the Academic books in their entirety (as we have them).
  • Reid, J. S. 1885. M. Tulli Ciceronis, Academica, London: MacMillan.
    • For textual analysis and philosophical commentary, Reid's edition is still valuable.

b. Select Bibliography of Secondary Literature

  • Brittain, C. 2001. Philo of Larissa: the Last of the Academic Sceptics, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • Though Brittain does not deal specifically with Cicero as a philosopher, he makes extensive use of the Academic books in reconstructing the positions held by Philo as well as the history of the Academy in general. This is a very carefully researched and comprehensive book. In addition to presenting a stimulating reconstruction of Philo's views, there is a very useful appendix containing all the testimonia on Philo along with translations.
  • Glucker, J. 1978. Antiochus and the Late Academy, Hypomnemata 56, Göttingen.
  • Glucker, J. 1988. "Cicero's Philosophical Affiliations," in Dillon, J.M. and A.A. Long, eds., The Question of "Eclecticism": Studies in Later Greek Philosophy, Berkeley.
  • Glucker, J. 1995. "Probabile, Veri Simile, and Related Terms," in Powell, ed.
  • Görler, W. 1995. "Silencing the troublemaker: De Legibus 1.39 and the Continuity of Cicero's Scepticism," in Powell, ed.
    • This is a response to an earlier article by Glucker which argues that Cicero changed his affiliation twice, once from a youthful adherence to the skeptical Academy to the more dogmatic position of Antiochus, and then later in life back again.
  • Mansfeld, J. and B. Inwood, eds. 1997. Assent and Argument: Studies in Cicero's Academic Books, Leiden: Brill.
    • This and the following volume are highly recommended as a starting point for further study in Cicero's skepticism and the late Academy in general.
  • Powell, J.G.F., ed. 1995. Cicero the Philosopher, Oxford.
  • Tarrant, H. 1985. Scepticism or Platonism, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Author Information

Harald Thorsrud
New Mexico State University
U. S. A.

Edward Caird (1835—1908)

cairdA Scottish philosopher of the latter half of the nineteenth century, Edward Caird was one of the key figures of the idealist movement that dominated British philosophy from 1870 until the mid 1920s. Best known for his studies of Kant and Hegel, he argued that "Kantian philosophy is only a first stage, though of course a necessary stage, in the transition of philosophy to higher forms of Idealism." Caird exercised a strong influence on the second generation of idealists, such as John Watson and Bernard Bosanquet. During his long and productive life, Caird was active in university and local politics and in educational and social reform. In his two series of Gifford lectures, he developed an important evolutionary account of religious conceptions ( the idea of the good, the soul, God, and the relation of God to humanity).

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Critique of Kant and Hegel
  3. Philosophical Style
  4. Evolution and Religion
  5. Reference and Further Reading

1. Biography

Edward Caird was born in Greenock, Scotland, on March 23, 1835. A younger brother of the theologian John Caird (1820-1898), Edward began his studies at the University of Glasgow (which he briefly abandoned due to ill health), later moving to Balliol College, Oxford, from which he graduated in 1863. Following his graduation, he became Tutor at Merton College, Oxford (1864-1866), but soon left for the Professorship of Moral Philosophy at Glasgow (1866-1893). There, in addition to carrying out his academic duties, Caird was active in university and local politics, and was responsible for establishing the study of political sciences at the University. Following the death of Benjamin Jowett (1817-1893), Caird returned to Oxford, where he served as Master of Balliol College until 1907. He was a founding fellow of the British Academy (1902), a corresponding member of the French Academy, and held honorary doctorates from the Universities of St Andrews (1883), Oxford (1891), Cambridge (1898) and Wales (1902).

Like many of the British idealists, Caird had a strong interest in classical literature. In his two volumes of Essays on Literature and Philosophy (1892), he brought together critical essays on Goethe, Rousseau, Carlyle, Dante and Wordsworth, with a discussion (in Volume II) of Cartesianism (Descartes, Malbranche and Spinoza) and metaphysics.

Caird's politics were generally liberal and progressive. He supported the education of women, opposed the Anglo-Boer War (1899-1902) and, like Green, was involved in the 'university settlement' programs--particularly in Glasgow and in London--where recent university graduates and professionals attempted to narrow the gap between social classes by living and working among and with the poor.

In 1907, Caird resigned his position as Master of Balliol, and died the following year on November 1. He is buried in St Sepulchre's Cemetery, Oxford, alongside Jowett and Green.

2. Critique of Kant and Hegel

Along with T.H. Green (1836-1882), Caird was one of the first generation of British idealists, whose philosophical work was largely in reaction to the then-dominant empiricist and associationist views of Alexander Bain (1818-1903) and J.S. Mill. He had, however, an ability of literary expression which Green did not possess; he was also more inclined to discuss questions by the method of tracing the historical development of the ideas involved. But while Green died at the early age of 47, Caird enjoyed a relatively long and productive life. It is, in part, for this reason that he exercised such a strong influence—particularly on the relation of philosophy and religion—on later idealists such as John Watson (1847-1939) and Bernard Bosanquet (1848-1923). Though often considered to be Hegelian, Caird was arguably more profoundly influenced by Kant, although he was far from an uncritical reader.

Caird's first major work was A Critical Account of the Philosophy of Kant (1877), focusing on the Critique of Pure Reason and the Prolegomena to any Future Metaphysics. It was superseded in 1889 by The Critical Philosophy of Immanuel Kant (two volumes) in which Caird wished to show the relation of the three Critiques and the continuity in the movement of Kant's thought. In general, Caird was convinced that, though Kant had inaugurated a new era in philosophy with his attempt to integrate the a priori and the a posteriori, he failed to carry out this task fully. It was here that Caird's idealism took over. In these volumes on Kant, Caird sought "to display in the very argument of the great metaphysician, who was supposed to have cut the world in two with a hatchet, an almost involuntary but continuous and inevitable regression towards objective organic unity." Thus, he argued that "Kantian philosophy is only a first stage, though of course a necessary stage, in the transition of philosophy to higher forms of Idealism." (1877, p. 667)

A sympathetic exposition of Hegel's philosophy is contained in his monograph on Hegel (1883) and, in 1885, his Social Philosophy and Religion of Comte (based on a collection of articles that had been previously published in the magazine, Contemporary Review) appeared. In these two works, Caird critically interprets these authors on lines of his own. Concerning Comte, for example, Caird writes that there cannot be a 'religion of Humanity' that is not, at the same time, a religion of God. In his treatment of Hegel, as of Kant, Caird's purpose was to show that there is a center of unity to which the mind must come back out of all differences, however varied and alien in appearance. The analysis was preliminary to reconstruction.

3. Philosophical Style

Caird's way of philosophizing differed from that of many of his contemporaries. It was consistently and even obtrusively constructive. According to Caird, "the true manner of honoring a thinker is to force oneself to understand him from his own point of view," and only then "to submit his ideas to as objective an examination as possible." Thus, he seized on the truths contained in the authors with whom he dealt, and was only incidentally concerned with their errors. One of the results of this, however, was that Caird's own views are often to be found only indirectly--that is, in his exposition and commentary of the views of others.

4. Evolution and Religion

Like many other idealists, such as D.G. Ritchie (1853-1903), Caird was concerned to show the relation of evolutionary theory to the development of thought and culture. His first set of Gifford lectures, The Evolution of Religion (2 volumes, 1893), deals less than his other works with an exposition of the views of other philosophers. These lectures focussed on the possibility of a science of religion and the nature of religion from Greek times, but were especially centered on the development of the Christian faith through to the Reformation. Caird shows the spiritual sense of humanity as at first dominated by the object, but constrained by its own abstractions to swing around so as to fall under the sway of the subject.

In 1904 Caird's second set of Gifford lectures, The Evolution of Theology in the Greek Philosophers,appeared. Here, he provides again an evolutionary account of religious conceptions (e.g., the idea of the good, the soul, God, and the relation of God to humanity) toward a 'reflective religion' or theology. The story of Greek philosophy, which Caird considered mainly (but not exclusively) in its relation to theology, was carried from Plato through Aristotle, the Stoics, and Philo, to Plotinus and--in the final lecture--to Christian theology and St. Augustine.

In general, Caird's views on religion were importantly related to his understanding of ethics, and Caird borrows from Hegel (and Goethe) the ethical idea of self sacrifice, or "dying to live," which was to have an important role in the work of Bosanquet. Caird consistently emphasized the importance of religion, and that a genuine metaphysics must be able to provide an account of it.

5. References and Further Reading

  • The Collected Works of Edward Caird, 12 Volumes, Ed. and Introd. Colin Tyler, Bristol, UK: Thoemmes Press, 1999.
  • A Critical Account of the Philosophy of Kant, with an Historical Introduction. Glasgow: J. Maclehose, 1877.
  • The Problem of Philosophy at the Present Time: an Introductory Address Delivered to the Philosophical Society of the University of Edinburgh. Glasgow, James Maclehose & sons, 1881. (43 p.)
  • Hegel, Philadelphia: J. B. Lippincott and co.; Edinburgh: W. Blackwood and sons, 1883.
  • The Social Philosophy and Religion of Comte. Glasgow: J. Maclehose and sons, 1885. New York, Macmillan, 1885.
  • The Moral Aspect of the Economical Problem; Presidential Address to the Ethical Society. London, Swan Sonnenschein, Lowrey & Co., 1888. (18 p.)
  • The Critical Philosophy of Immanuel Kant, Glasgow: J. Maclehose & sons, 1889; New York: Macmillan, 1889. 2 v.
  • Essays on Literature and Philosophy, Glasgow, J. Maclehose and sons, 1892. 2 v. [v. 1. Dante in his relation to the theology and ethics of the Middle Ages. Goethe and philosophy. Rousseau. Wordsworth. The problem of philosophy at the present time. The genius of Carlyle; v. 2. Cartesianism. Metaphysic.]
  • The Evolution of Religion. 2 v., Glasgow: James Maclehose, 1893; New York: Macmillan, 1893. [Gifford lectures; 1890/1891-1891/1892]
  • Address on Plato's Republic as the Earliest Educational Treatise, Delivered by Edward Caird at the Closing Ceremony of the Session 1893-94. Bangor: Jarvis & Foster, 1894 (22 p.)
  • The Evolution of Theology in the Greek Philosophers. 2 v., Glasgow: J. Maclehose and sons, 1904. [Gifford lectures, Glasgow; 1900/1901 and 1901-1902].
  • Idealism and the Theory of Knowledge. London: Henry Frowde, 1903 (14 p.)
  • Lay Sermons and Addresses : Delivered in the Hall of Balliol College, Oxford. Glasgow : J. Maclehose; New York: Macmillan, 1907.

The standard assessment of Caird's work is:

  • The Life and Philosophy of Edward Caird by Sir Henry Jones and John Henry Muirhead. Glasgow: Maclehose, Jackson and co., 1921.

The IEP desires a newer and more detailed article on Caird.

Author Information

Revised by William Sweet
U. S. A.

George Santayana (1863—1952)

santayanGeorge Santayana was an influential 20th century American thinker whose philosophy connected a rich diversity of historical perspectives, culminating in a unique and unrivaled form of materialism, one recommending a bold reconciliation of spirit and nature. Santayana was also a poet, and he wrote a work of fiction, The Last Puritan, that was a Book of the Month Club selection in 1936, the same year he adorned the cover of Time magazine. Though he spent his formative intellectual life in America and ultimately is best categorized philosophically in that tradition, Santayana spent the better part of his life and publishing career in Europe. He spent his early childhood in his birth-country of Spain and throughout his expansive travels and residencies never relinquished his native citizenship. Displaying in both composition and criticism a prodigious literary imagination, Santayana’s writings appealed to a wide audience, and he remains to this day one of the most quoted of twentieth century thinkers. Probably the most well-known sentence of Santayana’s is also one of the least accurately quoted: “Those who cannot remember the past are condemned to repeat it” (The Life of Reason: Reason in Common Sense. Scribner’s, 1905: 284). Scholarly interest in Santayana today remains modest but diverse. Santayana was a thinker of rare stature whose work deserves the highest compliment of all: it can and may well still be read millennia from now.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Writings
  3. Philosophy
    1. Ontology and Epiphenomenalism
    2. Realms and Terminology
    3. Realms Defined
  4. Naturalism in World Perspective
  5. Legacy
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. MIT Press Critical Editions
    2. Other Santayana Works
    3. Books About Santayana

1. Life

George Santayana was born on December 16, 1863 in Madrid, Spain. He lived his first eight years in Spain, his next forty years in Boston, and his last forty years in Europe. Accordingly, Santayana arranged his life in his autobiography, Persons and Places, in three parts: (1) “Background,” (2) “On Both Sides of the Atlantic,” and (3) “All on One Side.” The Background (1863-1886) encompassed his childhood in Ávila, Spain, through his undergraduate years at Harvard. The second period, during which Santayana traveled between the U.S. and Europe, covered his Harvard years (1886-1912), both as graduate student (Ph.D. 1889) and professor. The third period (1912-1952) was that of the retired professor writing and traveling in Europe, and eventually adopting Rome as his center of activity.

Santayana’s birth name was Jorge Agustín Nicolás Ruiz de Santayana. At the time of his birth Santayana’s father, Agustín Ruiz de Santayana, had only in the last few years met and married Josefina Borrás Sturgis, the recent widow of a Boston merchant named George Sturgis. While Agustín and Josefina united long enough to marry and produce young Jorge (the only child of their union), the two would ultimately part ways. Receiving financial support from her brother-in-law Robert (George Sturgis died leaving her little), Josefina decided to move herself and her surviving Sturgis children to Boston while for eight years young George and his father remained in Ávila. In 1872, father and son made the twelve-day sea voyage to Boston where Agustín briefly attempted to settle in with his wife and her Sturgis children, and, failing to do so, left young George with them to return to Spain in the spring of 1873. This early uprooting and estrangement from his father surely had a deep emotional impact on Santayana, and indeed in his autobiography he characterizes the move as a “moral disinheritance.”

Santayana had a rich early education, spending eight years at the Boston Latin School. He revealingly reflects on those early years (the fall of 1874 through 1882), in his autobiography: “…I know I was solitary and unhappy, out of humor with everything that surrounded me, and attached only to a persistent dream-life, fed on books of fiction, on architecture and on religion.” Besides Latin, students of the Boston Latin School studied Greek, Mathematics, History, French, English Composition, Literature, and Rhetoric. Through this exposure Santayana managed to develop a life-long appreciation for classical and medieval worlds and their cultural contributions, to a great extent preferring them to modern offerings. These appreciations would contribute a breadth of historical perspective to Santayana’s mature philosophical works that is unrivaled by his American contemporaries.

In his early education Santayana nurtured a love of poetry and even entertained seriously the possibility of becoming an architect. Entering Harvard upon graduation from the Latin School in 1882, Santayana respectively took his undergraduate and graduate degrees (B.A., ’86, Ph.D. ‘89), benefiting incalculably from the philosophical mentorship of his teachers, amongst whom were two of the most famous “golden age” Harvard philosophers: William James and Josiah Royce. Upon successful completion of his doctorate, Santayana, by now fully committed to the discipline, began teaching philosophy at Harvard in the fall of 1889. He would remain there until his departure at the zenith of academic success. In 1912 Santayana took advantage of a modest inheritance from the death of his mother to retire from Harvard, and left for Europe indefinitely.

As to his time in America, though he does offer the occasional fond or sympathetic reflection, Santayana largely hated academic life and commercialism and the dead Puritanism that he identified in his novel The Last Puritan. Probably referring obliquely to his own eventual feelings of exile in America, Santayana wrote: “It is natural for a man to like to live at home, and to live long elsewhere without a sense of exile is not good for his moral integrity” (Winds of Doctrine, Charles Scribner’s Sons, 1913, pg. 6).

He left the U.S. to live an intellectually free life in Oxford, Paris, and, after 1925, Rome. Unsuccessful in his efforts to leave Rome before World War II, on October 14, 1941 he entered the Clinica della Piccola Compagna di Maria, or “Convent of the Blue Nuns,” a hospital-clinic where he lived until his death in September of 1952. He is buried in the only Spanish plot in Rome’s Campo Verano Cemetery.

2. Writings

Next to Ralph Waldo Emerson, Santayana is arguably one of the best writers in the Classical American tradition. Most philosophers tend to read Santayana as a literary figure (which he is) rather than a serious philosopher (which he is also), part of which has to do with the fact that his publications strike in both directions simultaneously: an oddity from the perspective of a public that tends to quarantine the two areas of interest.

His philosophical works reflect two distinct periods, the early “humanistic” period in which he composed The Sense of Beauty (1896), Interpretations of Poetry and Religion (1900), and the five-volume The Life of Reason (1905-6); and the later “ontological” period which yielded Scepticism and Animal Faith (1923), and the four-volume ontology titled Realms of Being (between 1927 and 1940).

Santayana sometimes repudiated his earlier work, in part for its having the taint of academic life. He especially spoke down at times about the Life of Reason series for its association with the progressivism of the day, and it was later edited by Santayana and his late-life personal assistant and secretary, Daniel Cory, with the intent of removing some of its more humanistic overtones.

These authorial disparagements notwithstanding, The Life of Reason series holds up as one of the greatest philosophical works of the early half of the twentieth century. His peer and adversarial contemporary John Dewey praised the series in a review of 1907 as “the most adequate contribution America has yet made—always excepting Emerson—to moral philosophy” (John Dewey, in John Dewey: The Middle Works, Volume 4 [1907-1909], edited by Jo Ann Boydston, Southern Illinois University Press, 1977: 241). The series would have a lasting influence on naturalistic philosophy in the twentieth century.

In his budding writing career Santayana also published a volume of poetry (an 1894 collection titled Sonnets and Other Verses). Nevertheless his poetic muse would fade with the passing of years. Despite in his early years attracting a near-cult following of Harvard poets, and later maintaining the same mentorship through their Rome pilgrimages, letters, and solicitations of feedback, Santayana’s literary exertions would be restricted to fiction and philosophy.

Early in his career at Harvard, Santayana would feel the pressure to produce a work of philosophy. The Sense of Beauty (1896)—an exercise in aesthetic formalism—was culled from a series of lectures he gave between 1892 and 1893 as a newly appointed Harvard professor. The book contains the famous definition of beauty as “pleasure regarded as a quality of the thing.” To this day The Sense of Beauty is arguably the most widely read of Santayana’s philosophical corpus. This is most likely due to its restrictive scope in comparison to his other philosophical works, while there has been the tendency for Santayana’s more ambitious philosophy to be neglected. This neglect probably will subside with the ongoing MIT Press Critical Edition publications of The Works of Santayana, edited by William G. Holzberger and Herman J. Saatkamp, Jr.

After The Sense of Beauty, Santayana published Interpretations of Poetry and Religion in 1900, a work which famously provoked William James—Santayana’s then-recent colleague—to characterize his philosophy as a “perfection of rottenness.” The book also provoked a key recognition from the other of Santayana’s early influential mentors, and also dissertation advisor, Josiah Royce. Santayana relates that Royce told him around the time of Interpretations that “the gist of [his] philosophy [is] the separation of essence from existence” (“Apologia Pro Mente Sua” in The Library of Living Philosophers: The Philosophy of George Santayana, edited by Paul Arthur Schilpp, New York: Tudor Publishing, pg. 497). The ontological categories of “essence” and “matter” would become key components of Santayana’s mature philosophy. (See section 3c.)

Besides being a poet, philosopher, and novelist, Santayana was a hugely influential cultural critic. In a trenchant 1911 address before the Philosophical Union in California he coined the term “genteel tradition” and memorably provided the characterization of America as an “old wine in new bottles.” He wrote many similarly speculatively rich essays diagnosing the cultural character of the America of his time, some of which included penetrating philosophical criticisms of his contemporaries and former teachers, James and Royce. These diagnoses were early collected in the volume Character and Opinion in the United States (1920).

None of Santayana’s writings stray entirely from philosophical considerations, including his only fictional novel. Santayana authored a single best-selling work of fiction titled The Last Puritan, published in 1936. He spent several of his post-Harvard years composing the book, and many of the main characters reflect personalities close to the author. The main theme of the novel (co-titled: “Memoir in the Form of a Novel”) is of interest for its enhancing one’s understanding of Santayana’s view towards America. It chronicles the tragic, sacrificial life of Oliver Alden, the title-subject, a romantic and pious youth whose inner religious sensibilities conflict with the pulsating natural life around him. Alden is from one standpoint a sympathetic character, one with whom the author himself admitted affinities. But from another standpoint the protagonist represented the tragic contemporary American as Santayana understood him—partly in reaction to troubled young poets and artists Santayana knew from his Harvard days.

Santayana’s broader cultural criticism can be found in such works as Winds of Doctrine (1913) and the beautiful and unforced Soliloquies in England (1922), remarkably written amidst the uncertain, violent times of World War I. The latter is an exemplary instance—of which two others include Dialogues in Limbo (1926) and Platonism and the Spiritual Life (1927)—where one finds the post-Harvard Santayana following inspirations as they come, allowing both his literary imagination and penetrating philosophical eye to take equal share in the interpretive task.

These shorter works undoubtedly provided opportunities of creative release for Santayana as the ambitious project of conceiving a system of philosophy began to assert itself. In 1923 Scepticism and Animal Faith (hereafter SAF), the introductory text to his four-volume system of philosophy was published. SAF is one of the few Santayana works to have remained in print up to the present. The book introduces the terminology and critical background of his mature ontology, itself unfolded in four volumes over the period of thirteen years.

3. Philosophy

a. Ontology and Epiphenomenalism

Despite minor shifts in emphasis and Santayana’s own attitude towards his work, there is no radical break between the early humanistic Santayana, and the mature, ontological one. The same persistent distinction between ideals and natural grounds for those ideals—which he calls in his mature ontology “essence” and “matter”—holds throughout all of Santayana’s works; and the same abiding concern for reconciling moral with natural life remains intact.

As Royce had prophesied, an ontological distinction persisted throughout Santayana’s works: between “essence,” or the infinite realm of character embodiments that any existing thing must take on in order to be experienced by humans, and “existence,” or the groundless causal flux of nature that underlies any form whatsoever.

In the Life of Reason Santayana emphasizes the distinction between “perfections” or “ideals” and their “natural roots” which he sometimes calls a “natural ground” or “basis” for all action, thought and experience: “Every genuine ideal has a natural basis…Ideals are legitimate, and each initially envisages a genuine and innocent good; but they are not realizable together, nor even singly when they have no deep roots in the world.” Such ideals then are not Platonic forms, in that they have “roots” and bear the marks of their natural origins. Plato’s forms, on the contrary, are conceived as entirely foreign to natural origins.

But Santayana’s terminological shift from talking of ideals and natural grounds to talking of essence and matter perhaps did come at a certain cost. Throughout the evolution of his thinking Santayana holds to an increasing, and to many interpreters troubling, epiphenomenal view of consciousness. Briefly, epiphenomenalism is the view that mind is derivative, wholly caused, and has itself no causal power. Such strong epiphenomenalism comes out in the following passage from RB: “…the realm of matter cannot admit mind into its progressive structure and movement; each trope or rhythm must be complete before sensation can arise; so that this sensation is intrinsically a result and not a cause, a comment and not an agent…” If mind and sensation appear on the scene only as after-effects, one has to wonder how human experience can be considered fulfilling—how more specifically it can be anything but an ineffectual, spectator process.

There is however more than this to Santayana’s view of mind and accompanying story of human experience. To see this one needs a further understanding of the definitive concepts of his mature philosophy.

b. Realms and Terminology

The four realms of being Santayana identifies, in the order in which he published each RB volume, are essence, matter, truth, and spirit. The realms are said by Santayana to be “qualities of reality” (RB 183) (not themselves to be confused as parts of the cosmos), that are worth distinguishing to render human experience more fulfilling, intelligent, and edifying.

Santayana holds that the realms are irreducibly different and are for that reason worth distinguishing. The possibility that there are more realms is not something he dismisses; his only condition for an additional realm is that it be irreducibly distinct from the four he distinguishes.

As indicated, before introducing the realms individually Santayana set up their presentation through a penetrating and synthetic critical introduction, published in 1923 as Scepticism and Animal Faith. Understanding the project of SAF requires acquaintance with the meaning of key original concepts, amongst which are: “intuition,” “intent,” “psyche,” “animal faith,” and “skepticism.”

All belief, Santayana writes, is “a form of some faith in animal, material existence.” What Santayana calls “animal faith,” is the instinctive (if you will) and unavoidable tendency for human actions to betray a deep belief in the existence of matter. On Santayana’s account, one cannot act without believing in matter. According to Santayana, the denial in speech or dialectical skepticism of the existence of matter is a solipsistic, momentary pose. So philosophers like Descartes and Berkeley are transcendental posers, inflexibly denying in theory what they unhesitatingly affirm in practice. Worse yet, however: these Modern’s conflate functional orientations of the mind which Santayana respectively distinguishes as “intuition” and “intent.”

“Intuition” is for Santayana the contemplation or consciousness of an essence (more on these shortly) apart from belief in any particular existence. Santayana contrasts “intent” from intuition in order to capture the process of “taking” essences as existences. When we interact with, manipulate, engage, or otherwise encounter what we experience as physical objects, we are imbuing essences with intent—giving them a material existence they can never literally have. This process of intent is governed by the preferential makeup of what Santayana terms “psyche.”

The psyche is the material set of preferences that define individuality in organisms. The psyche is, very simply, the material manifestation of mind and as such it is imbued with, defined by, and stricken with belief. When one is believing, one is acting on behalf of one’s psyche. When one is intuiting essences without the addition of belief in their existence—be it a revery, daydream, or performative trance as in a locked moment of harmonious activity—one is communing spiritually with the realm of essence.

This raises the issue of skepticism: if we only ever have a symbolic grasp of material reality, and we can at any point imaginatively “escape” such symbolic play, what’s to keep us from relapsing into Cartesian (re)pose? The first ten chapters of SAF are an exercise in engaging Cartesianism, with the goal of pushing skepticism to its “ultimate” limits.

As a skeptic Descartes was half-hearted according to Santayana (as regards naturalism he also accused his contemporary John Dewey of this), in that he thought skepticism ceased with awareness of the self. For Santayana, nothing overcomes skepticism except pure intuition, the irony of which is the fact that pure intuition issues in the “discovery of essence,” which is itself a bankruptcy of knowledge (see “essence” below). So where Descartes had sought the most indubitable knowledge, and proceeded on the principle that such a thing could be achieved, Santayana tries to show in SAF that the principle of indubitable knowledge is itself a paradox; when knowledge is tested by way of a radical skepticism, and certainty is the ultimate goal, the paradox is that certainty is achieved only at the cost of knowledge itself. “Certainty,” for Santayana, is thus a transcendent vision of essence and as such has nothing to do with knowledge, much less with science.

So the goal of SAF is to bankrupt Cartesianism, and in doing so to suggest a new starting point for philosophy. That starting point is animal faith, the tacit acceptance of material reality as the source of understanding, knowledge, and common sense. Hence the title: “Skepticism AND Animal Faith”: we need skepticism to intellectually clear the way for, and at the same time to lead us back to, natural intelligence—to the realms themselves!

c. Realms Defined

Essence: The realm of essence should be understood to have a certain primacy since it is infinite and pertains to all of the forms or definite character embodiments that material objects and events may take on. Essence is what Santayana defines as the most radical sense in which anything is or has a character. Nothing—be it material objects, objects of thought, imaginings, flights of fancy, or objects of logical deduction—is experienced except through the mediation, or more accurately, “im-mediation” of essences. In his inimitable way, Santayana says of essences that they are “the only things people ever see and the last they notice.” Essences are said by Santayana to designate the realm of internal or intrinsic relations, and awareness of essences indicates a departure from what is called “knowledge,” which he defines as “faith mediated by symbols.” Awareness of essence is just that: awareness; it is direct and unmediated and as such entails no faith (belief in realities not given).

Matter: The catch however is that Santayana is a thoroughgoing materialist, in that he holds that no form can appear to human intuition without the previous establishment of material conditions for that form to arise. Matter is the primordial existential flux and is an unintelligible “surd.” This does not mean, however, that matter cannot be “known,” at least provisionally. Like Spinoza’s substance, existence or matter for Santayana has no purpose, but imposes external, natural limits to all activity. Those external limits define human life and mark off the boundaries between human understanding and the unfathomable depths of material existence. Santayana holds that humans know matter only at a remove, that is, (to repeat) symbolically. Matter is in fact referred to by Santayana as a “metaphor” only, producing one of the more provocative aspects of his philosophy: science is no less literary than poetry in representing matter in that it must express its truths at a remove, through the lens of human bias. In this sense Santayana’s materialism is, to use a contemporary term, “non-reductive.” Whatever scientists keep telling us of matter, while it is the hallmark of wisdom to defer everyday understanding to these experts (their findings do after all indicate a provisional advance upon previous understanding and serve contemporary sympathies very well), it is for Santayana only spiritual nearsightedness to deem such knowledge exhaustive of the cosmos.

Truth: As a fourth realm of being, truth wasn’t conceived by Santayana until after the first three (essence, matter and spirit) had been distinguished, and may therefore be justly supposed to have been introduced somewhat ad hoc. Whatever the reason, by 1913 (10 years before the publication of SAF) Santayana had conceived truth to round out his fourfold ontology. Truth is alleged by Santayana to be a subset of the infinite realm of essence. The realm of truth is the total inventory of essences instantiated by matter. The master metaphor for truth is given by Santayana in RB as: “Truth is the furrow which matter must plow upon the face of essence.” All events that take place entail concatenations of essences elected by matter for appearance in the course of human life, and their objective relations—factual arrangement, for example, that the terrorist attacks in America in 2001 took place on September 11th rather than the 12th—introduce the possibility of truth for human understanding.

Though there are similarities, Santayana’s view of truth differs in important respects from that of Classical pragmatists: truth for Santayana is fully objective and not necessarily presupposing of a cognizing agent; it is the necessary condition for the possibility of true opinions (Santayana appeals to the self-conscious act of lying as evidence of this fact); judgments are true if and only if they faithfully reproduce a portion of the descriptive properties of the process of the world coming, becoming, and going away into existence. These features of truth are guaranteed by the eternal status of the terms of its acknowledgement: essences.

Thus the pragmatist account of truth as what “works,” in the sense of what fits the current standard comprehensive description of the world is acceptable to Santayana so long as there is an understanding that the terms that make truth possible, namely, essences, are eternal, everlasting possibilities of experience that are not reducible to that experience. This is where Santayana especially departs from the pragmatist account of truth: it is not reducible to experience.

Spirit: Finally, Santayana distinguishes the realm of spirit, which is neither more nor less mysterious than one’s everyday understanding of consciousness. Santayana defines consciousness as the “total inner difference between being asleep and awake.” John Lachs has characterized Santayana’s spirit as that part of a life constituted by its series of intuitions. The native affinity of mind is, according to Santayana, to essence and not to fact. (This is an important outcome of his engagement with and overcoming of Cartesianism.) As such consciousness may play with appearances apart from the believing intent of the organic manifestation of mind (psyche); to the extent that it does so play, the spiritual life has been lived. Spirit is the ability of mind to turn natural events and experiences into appearances of themselves, and in so doing allow a healthy cosmic repose even as nature moves ceaselessly, beautifully, and sometimes destructively along.

In this way the core contribution of Santayana’s philosophy can be seen to culminate in a reconciliation of spirit and nature, two realities very much at odds in contemporary life. Santayana’s status as something of an “acquired taste” philosopher may plausibly be argued to be a function of his uncommon ability to uphold two sincere sympathies: on the one hand with Platonism and the spiritual life, and on the other with the life of reason which includes an openness to the advantages of three phases of moral life he called in that same-titled volume “pre-rational morality,” “rational ethics,” and “post-rational morality.”

4. Naturalism in World Perspective

As should not be surprising from what has been presented, Santayana consistently praises select philosophers and philosophies from history for what he considers their “naturalistic piety.” From the Ancient world, Santayana was deeply impressed with Lucretius, and also what he gleaned from Eastern Indian philosophy. Of the Modern philosophers, Santayana reserves his highest praise for Spinoza.

Backed by these historical allies, Santayana provides in a soliloquy a memorable (if partly irreverent) arrangement of world-philosophies:

…the progress of philosophy has not been of such a sort that the latest philosophers are the best: it is quite the other way…the later we come down in the history of philosophy the less important philosophy becomes, and the less true in fundamental matters.
Suppose I arrange the works of the essential philosophers—leaving out secondary and transitional systems—in a bookcase of four shelves; on the top shelf (out of reach since I can’t read the language) I will place the Indians; on the next the Greek naturalists; and to remedy the unfortunate paucity of their remains, I will add here those free inquirers of the renaissance, leading to Spinoza, who after two thousand years picked up the thread of scientific speculation; and besides, all modern science: so that this shelf will run over into a whole library of what is not ordinarily called philosophy. On the third shelf I will put Platonism, including Aristotle, the Fathers, the Scholastics, and all honestly Christian theology; and on the last, modern or subjective philosophy in its entirety. I will leave lying on the table, as of doubtful destination, the works of my contemporaries. There is much life in some of them. I like their water-colour sketches of self-consciousness, their rebellious egotisms, their fervid reforms of phraseology, their peep-holes through which some very small part of things may be seen very clearly: they have lively wits, but they seem to me like children playing blind-man’s-buff; they are keenly excited at not knowing where they are. (“The Progress of Philosophy,” in Soliloquies in England and Later Soliloquies, Charles Scribner’s Sons, 1922: 208-210)

Santayana recommends placing on the bottom, "inferior" shelves all the philosophy that is published, reprinted, and discussed in universities across the Western world today. This recommendation motivated one critic to characterize Santayana as a "defiant eclectic" (Charles Hartshorne, "Santayana's Defiant Eclecticism" in The Journal of Philosophy, Vol. LXI. No. 1, 1964: 35-44), suggesting that his thinking amounts to a high-minded circumvention of the real problems of philosophy through the sublimation of a few eccentric doctrines. This point is still an issue among Santayana scholars. What is clear is that Santayana combined an indisputably rich reading of the history of philosophy with an unparalleled synoptic critical vision.

5. Legacy

Santayana’s philosophy has had a modest, unsettled legacy, one which nevertheless surprises in its continuing ability to attract sensibilities from across academic disciplines. While his thinking never has, and likely never will be, given to indoctrination or discipleship, it is clear that Santayana never conceived of these as important and justifiably suspected that such things were bad rather than good indications that a philosophy is worthy of the world it struggles to understand.

Still, a glowing campfire of devotion to Santayana’s work persists, first through the institutional support of the MIT Press and the staff of the Santayana Edition at Indiana University-Purdue University Indianapolis (IUPUI); and second from the scholarly contributions made to the only Santayana journal, Overheard in Seville: Bulletin of the Santayana Society. The Bulletin is published annually and is edited by Angus Kerr-Lawson. The Santayana Society meets annually in December at the Eastern gathering of the American Philosophical Association and has recently been added to the proceedings of the annual meetings of the Society for the Advancement of American Philosophy. MIT Press is in the process of publishing a critical edition of The Works of George Santayana, several of which are currently released.

The future of Santayana studies, whatever their course, will depend upon genuine interest in a non-reductive philosophical naturalism that expresses deep respect to religious sensibilities and leads the charge for the return to a conception of philosophy as a way of life rather than as a critical profession with little relevance to inner experience.

6. References and Further Reading

a. MIT Press Critical Editions

All works by George Santayana are undergoing republication as critical editions through MIT Press, under the editorship of William G. Holzberger and Herman J. Saatkamp, Jr., and the editorial work of those affiliated with the Santayana Edition at Indiana University-Purdue University Indianapolis.

  • Persons and Places (1987).
  • The Sense of Beauty (1988).
  • Interpretations of Poetry and Religion (1990).
  • The Last Puritan (1994).
  • The Letters of George Santayana: Books I-VIII (2001-2008).

b. Other Santayana Works

  • Animal Faith and Spiritual Life. Edited by John Lachs. New York: Appleton-Century- Crofts, 1967.
  • The Birth of Reason and Other Essays. Daniel Cory, editor. New York and London: Columbia University Press, 1968.
  • Character and Opinion in the United States. New York, Charles Scribner’s Sons: 1921.
  • Dialogues in Limbo. The University of Michigan Press, 1948.
  • Dominations and Powers: Reflections on Liberty, Society, and Government. New York, Charles Scribner’s Sons: 1951.
  • Egotism in German Philosophy. Charles Scribner’s Sons, 1940.
  • Essays in Literary Criticism. Edited by Irving Singer. New York, Charles Scribner’s Sons: 1956.
  • The Genteel Tradition: Nine Essays by George Santayana. Lincoln and London: The University of Nebraska Press, 1967.
  • The Idea of Christ in the Gospels. New York, Charles Scribner’s Sons: 1946.
  • Life of Reason or The Phases of Human Progress, One Volume Edition. New York: Charles Scribner’s Sons, 1955.
  • Obiter Scripta. New York, Charles Scribner’s Sons: 1936.
  • The Philosophy of Santayana. Edited by Irwin Edman. The Modern Library, 1936.
  • Poems. New York, Charles Scribner’s Sons: 1923.
  • The Realms of Being. New York, Charles Scribner’s Sons: 1942.
  • Santayana on America: Essays, Notes, and Letters on American Life, Literature, and Philosophy. Edited by Richard Colton Lyon. New York: Harcourt, Brace & World, Inc., 1968.
  • Scepticism and Animal Faith. New York: Dover Publications, 1923, 1955.
  • Soliloquies in England and Later Soliloquies. New York, Charles Scribner’s Sons: 1922.
  • Some Turns of Thought in Modern Philosophy. New York, Charles Scribner’s Sons: 1933.
  • Winds of Doctrine: Studies in Contemporary Opinion. New York, Charles Scribner’s Sons: 1913.

c. Books About Santayana

  • Ames, Van Meter. Proust and Santayana: The Aesthetic Way of Life. New York: Willett, Clark & Company, 1937.
  • Arnett, Willard E. Santayana and the Sense of Beauty. Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1957.
  • Butler, Richard. The Life and World of George Santayana. Chicago: A Gateway Edition, 1960.
  • Coleman, Martin; Santayana Edition (IUPUI).  The Essential Santayana: Selected Writings.  Compiled with an introduction by Martin Coleman and the Santayana Edition at IUPUI.  Indiana University Press, 2009.
  • Cory, Daniel. The Letters of George Santayana. New York, Charles Scribner’s Sons: 1955.
  • Cory, Daniel. Santayana: The Later Years; A Portrait With Letters. New York: George Braziller, 1963.
  • Flamm, Matthew Caleb and Krzysztof Piotr Skowronski. Under Any Sky: Contemporary Readings of George Santayana. Newcastle: Cambridge Scholars Publishing, 2007.
  • Howgate, George W. George Santayana. New York: A.S. Barnes and Co., Inc., 1961.
  • Lachs, John. On Santayana. Wadsworth, 2000.
  • Lachs, John with Michael Hodges. Thinking in the Ruins: Wittgenstein and Santayana on Contingency. Vanderbilt University Press, 2000.
  • Levinson, Henry Samuel. Santayana, Pragmatism, and the Spiritual Life. Chapel Hill and London: The University of North Carolina Press: 1992.
  • Lamont, Corliss, editor. Dialogue on George Santayana. New York: Horizon Press, 1959.
  • Munson, Thomas N. The Essential Wisdom of George Santayana. New York: Columbia University Press, 1962.
  • Schilpp, Paul Arthur, editor. The Library of Living Philosophers: The Philosophy of George Santayana. New York: Tudor Publishing Company, 1951.
  • Singer, Irving. George Santayana, Literary Philosopher. Yale University Press, 2000.
  • Sprigge, Timothy. Santayana. London and New York: Routledge, 1995.
  • Woodward, Anthony. Living in the Eternal: A Study of George Santayana. Nashville: Vanderbilt University Press, 1988.

Author Information

Matthew Caleb Flamm
Rockford College
U. S. A.

Gorgias (483—375 B.C.E.)

Gorgias was a Sicilian philosopher, orator, and rhetorician. He is considered by many scholars to be one of the founders of sophism, a movement traditionally associated with philosophy, that emphasizes the practical application of rhetoric toward civic and political life. The sophists were itinerant teachers who accepted fees in return for instruction in oratory and rhetoric, and many claimed they could teach anything and its opposite (thesis and antithesis). Another aspect of their method was the ability to make the weaker argument the stronger. The term sophist in classical Greek was a general appellation denoting a "wise man." They were important figures in Greece in the 4th and 5th centuries, and their social success was great. Plato was the first to use the term rhêtorikê, while the sophists termed their "art" logos . Nevertheless, Gorgias is commonly associated with the development of rhetoric in classical Greece. The democratic process in Athens supplied the need for instruction in both rhetoric and philosophy.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Works
  2. Philosophy
    1. Ontology & Epistemology
    2. Rhetorical Theory
  3. Critics
  4. References and Further Reading

1. Life and Works

Gorgias (483-375 B.C.E.) came to Greece from Leontini in Sicily. Little is known of his life before he arrived in Athens in 427 B.C.E. as a political ambassador seeking military assistance against Syracuse, a city-state in Sicily. He delivered a series of speeches that dazzled the Athenian audiences and won him fame and admiration. Upon completion of his mission, he traveled throughout Greece as a teacher of rhetoric and as an orator, and according to Aristotle, spoke at the Panhellenic festivals (Art of Rhetoric 1414b29). He was a student of Empedocles, and according to Quintilian and others, was the teacher of Isocrates. Plato identifies Meno (Meno 76Aff) among the students of Gorgias, and he may have been one of Aspasia's instructors as well. Many of the sophists set up schools and charged fees in return for instruction in rhetoric, and Gorgias was no exception. Philostratus (Lives of the Sophists I 9, I) tells us that Gorgias began the practice of extemporaneous oratory, and that he had the boldness to say "'suggest a subject' ...he was the first to proclaim himself willing to take the chance, showing apparently that he knew everything and would trust the moment to speak on any subject." He died at the age of 108 at Larissa in Thessaly.

Four works are attributed to Gorgias: On the Nonexistent or On Nature, the Apology of Palamedes, the Encomium on Helen, and the Epitaphios or Athenian Funeral Oration. The original text of On Nature has been lost, and survives only in two different paraphrases, one in Sextus Empiricus' Against the Professors and another in an anonymous work entitled Melissus, Xenophanes, Gorgias. There are two different manuscripts of Palamedes and Helen (the Cripps and Palatine versions), one slightly different than the other. Legal historians consider the Defense of Palamedes to be an important contribution to dicanic [explanatory] argumentation, and some cultural historians believe the Epitaphios was used as a stylistic and genre source for Plato's Menexenus (Cosigny 2). Gorgias' rhyming style is highly poetic, and he viewed the orator as an individual leading a kind of group incantation. He employs metaphor and figurative expressions to illustrate his assertions, and even uses humor as one instrument of refutation. The term macrologia (using more words than necessary in an effort to appear eloquent) is sometimes used to describe his oratorical technique (Kennedy 63).

2. Philosophy

Any student of Gorgias must immediately mark the distinction between his philosophy as expressed by Plato in the dialogue Gorgias (see below) and his philosophy found within the three works: On the Nonexistent, the Apology of Palamedes, and the Encomium on Helen.

a. Ontology & Epistemology

Nowhere is Gorgias' sophistical love of paradox more evident than in the short treatise On the Nonexistent or On Nature. The subject of this work is ontological (concerning nature of being), but it also deals with language and epistemology (the study of the nature and limitations of knowledge). In addition to this, it can be understood as an exercise in sophistical rhetoric; Gorgias tackles an argument that is seemingly impossible to refute, namely that, after considering our world, we must come to the conclusion that "things exist." His powerful argument to the contrary proves his abilities as a master of oratory, and some believe the text was used as an advertisement of his credentials.

Gorgias begins his argument by presenting a logical contradiction, "if the nonexistent exists, it will both exist and not exist at the same time" (B3.67) (a violation of the principle of non-contradiction). He then denies that existence (to on) itself exists, for if it exists, it is either eternal or generated. If it is eternal, it has no beginning, and is therefore without limit. If it is without limit, it is "nowhere" (B3.69), and hence does not exist. And if existence is generated, it must come from something, and that something is existence, which is another contradiction. Likewise, nonexistence (to mê on) cannot produce anything (B3.71). The sophist then explains that existence can neither be "one" (hen) or "many" (polla), since if it were one, it would be divisible, and therefore not one. If it were many, it would be a "composite of separate entities" (B3.74) and no longer the thing known as existence.

Gorgias then turns his attention to what is knowable and comprehensible. He remarks, "if things considered [imagined or thought] in the mind are not existent, the existent is not considered" (B3.77), that is to say, existence is incomprehensible. This supposition is backed up by the fact that one can imagine chariots racing in the sea, but that does not make such a thing happen. The operation of the mind (intellection) is fundamentally distinct from what happens in the real world; "the existent is not an object of consideration and is not apprehended" (B3.82). It is helpful to think of apprehension here in Aristotelian terms, as simple apprehension, the first operation of reasoning (logic) in which the intellect "grasps" or "apprehends" something. Simple apprehension happens when the mind first forms a concept of something in the world, and is anterior to judgment.

Finally, Gorgias proclaims that even if existence could be apprehended, "it would be incapable of being conveyed to another" (B3.83). This is because what we reveal to another is not an external substance, but is merely logos (from the Greek verb lego, "to say"--see below). Logos is not "substances and existing things" (B3.84). External reality becomes the revealer of logos (B3.85); while we can know logos, we cannot apprehend things directly. The color white, for instance, goes from a property of a thing, to a mental representation, and the representation is different than the thing itself. In its summation, this nihilistic argument becomes a "trilemma":

i. Nothing exists
ii. Even if existence exists, it cannot be known
iii. Even if it could be known, it cannot be communicated.

This argument has led some to label Gorgias as either an ontological skeptic or a nihilist (one who believes nothing exists, or that the world is incomprehensible, and that the concept of truth is fictitious). But it can also be interpreted as an assertion that it is logos and logos alone which is the proper object of our inquiries, since it is the only thing we can really know. On Nature is sometimes seen as a refutation of pre-Socratic essentialist philosophy (McComiskey 37).

b. Rhetorical Theory

Most of what we know concerning Gorgias' views on rhetoric comes from the Encomium. This work can be understood as a sophistical effort to rehabilitate the reputation of Helen of Troy. In it, Gorgias attempts to take the weaker argument and make it the stronger one, by arguing for a position contrary to well-established opinion: in this case, the opinion that Helen was to blame for the Trojan War. Gorgias argues that Helen succumbed either to (a) physical force (Paris' abduction), (b) love (eros), or (c) verbal persuasion (logos), and in any instance, she cannot be blamed for her actions. According to Gorgias, logos is a powerful force that can be used nefariously to convince people to do things against their own interests. It can take the form of poetry (metrical language), divine incantations, or oratory. Logos is described as a "powerful lord" (B11.8) and "[t]he effect of speech upon the condition of the soul is comparable to the power of drugs over the nurture of bodies" (B11.14). This should be contrasted with the view of Isocrates that logos is a "chief" or "commander" (Nicoles 5-9). The difference here is subtle, but Gorgias' dynastic concept of logos clearly turns it into a despotic overlord, while Isocrates' "commander" is a leader with delegated authority, an individual who fights along side his troops.

Examples of persuasive speech, according to Gorgias, are the "conflicts among the philosophers’ arguments in which the swiftness of demonstration and judgment make the belief in any opinion changeable" (B11.13). This is similar to the assertion of Sextus Empiricus that equally convincing arguments can be formed against, or in favor of, any subject. Gorgias may have believed in a relative notion of truth that was contingent upon a particular kairos (an opportune moment or "opening"), that is to say, truth can only be found within a given moment. He seems to reject the idea of truth as a philosophically universal principle, and thus comes into conflict with Plato and Aristotle. Nevertheless, the rhetor (orator) is ethically obligated to avoid deception, and it is "the duty of the same man both to declare what he should rightly and to refute what has been spoken falsely" (B11.2). Ultimately, Gorgias’ opinion concerning truth is difficult to ascertain, but from his writings, we can conclude that he was more concerned with rhetorical argument than the truth of any given proposition or assertion.

In the epideictic speech Defense of Palamedes, Gorgias uses a mythical narrator (Palamedes) to further illustrate his rhetorical technique and philosophy. In the Odyssey, Palamedes was responsible for revealing Odysseus' "madness" as a fiction, an act for which the latter never forgave him. Ultimately, Palamedes was executed for treason, after Odysseus accused him of conspiring with the Trojans. Gorgias focuses on the invention of arguments (topoi) necessary to exonerate Palamedes within the setting of a fictional trial, all of which depend upon probability. Palamedes could not have committed treason with a foreign power since he speaks no language other than Greek (B11a.6-7), and no Greek desires social power among barbarians (B11a.13). In the second example, we see that topoi "embody the values of the community, in the sense that they comprise what the community considers important" (Cosigny 84). A fundamental difference between the topoi found within Aristotle's Art of Rhetoric and Gorgias' topoi is that Aristotle's are "acontextual, while Gorgias places his in the narrative context of the Palamedes myth" (McComiskey 49). Therefore, there is a direct relationship between kairos and invention.

Gorgias rejects the use of pathos (emotional appeal) in his Defense, with the assertion that "among you, who are the foremost of the Greeks ...there is no need to persuade such ones as you with the aid of friends and sorrowful prayers and lamentations" (B11a.33). He prefers to use ethos (ethical appeal, or arguments from character) and logos, as his instruments of persuasion.

3. Critics

Gorgias' most famous critic is Plato. In the dialogue Gorgias, Plato (through his mentor Socrates) expresses his contempt for sophistical rhetoric; all rhetoric is "a phantom of a branch of statesmanship (463d) ...a kind of flattery ...that is contemptible," because its aim is simply pleasure rather than the welfare of the public. Nor can rhetoric be considered an art (technê), since it is irrational (465a). The end result of rhetoric is a cosmetic alteration of language that conceals truth and falsity (465b). Furthermore, rhetoric is "designed to produce conviction, but not educate people, about matters of right or wrong (455a). The character of Gorgias in the dialogue is forced to admit that his "art" deals with opinion (doxa) rather than knowledge (epistemê); that its intention is to persuade rather than to instruct, and that rhetoric deals with language without regard to content. Gorgias is portrayed as a man with an ambivalent attitude towards truth, a relativist, who boldly asserts that it does not matter if one truly has knowledge of any given subject, only that he is perceived by others to have knowledge, and that "[r]hetoric is the only area of expertise you need to learn. You can ignore all the rest and still get the better of the professionals!" (459c).

There are a number of explanations for Plato's antipathy towards sophistic rhetoric. The first is simply philosophical; Plato was not a relativist, nor did he believe rhetoric had a pedagogical value. But there is also a political element to be considered. Bruce McComiskey points out that Plato believed in an "oligarchic government" for Athens, while many of the sophists "favored the Athenian Democracy the way it was" (20). It is important to point out that during Gorgias' lifetime, both Leontini and Athens were democratic city states and a loose alliance existed between the two. On a more practical level, the Greek city states also served as a market for those who would sell instruction in rhetoric.

Aristotle dismisses Gorgias as a "frigid" stylist who indulges in excessive use of compound words such as "begging-poet-flatterers" and "foresworn and well-sworn" (Art of Rhetoric 1405b34). He also faults Gorgias for overly poetic language (1406b4), and we can see examples of this in Gorgias' description of logos as a great dynast or lord (B11.8) and as a "drug" (B11.14). The sophist compares orators to "frogs croaking in water"(B3.30), and philosophers to the "suitors of Penelope" (B3.29).

Despite efforts by G.W.F Hegel and George Grote toward rehabilitating the reputations of Gorgias and the other sophists in the 19th century, the sophists still had a foul reputation well into the 20th century (as evidenced by the pejorative term "sophistry"). In 1930, French philosopher Jacques Maritain remarked "[s]ophistry is not a system of ideas, but a vicious attitude of the mind;" the sophists "came to consider as the most desirable form of knowledge the art of refuting and disproving by skillful arguments" (32-33). In recent years, however, modernists and post-structuralists have found great value in the philosophy of Gorgias, especially his theories on truth and language.

4. References and Further Reading

Note: the citations above regarding Gorgias' statements follow the alpha-numeric system used by Sprague (see below) in the text The Older Sophists (B3=On Non-Being, B11=Encomium on Helen, B11a=Defense of Palamedes).

  • Aristotle. The Art of Rhetoric. Trans. John Henry Freese. London: WM Heinemann, 1967.
  • Barrett, Harold. The Sophists: Rhetoric, Democracy, and Plato's Idea of Sophistry. Novata: Chandler & Sharp, 1987.
  • Consigny, Scott. Gorgias: Sophist and Artist. Columbia: University of South Carolina, 2001.
  • Freeman, Kathleen. Ancilla to the Pre-Socratic Philosophers. Cambridge: Harvard, 1948.
  • Gorgias. Encomium of Helen. Trans. Douglas MacDowell. Glasgow: Bristol Classics, 1982.
  • Isocrates. Isocrates. 3 vols. Trans. George Norlin and LaRue Van Hook. Cambridge: Harvard, 1968.
  • Jarratt, Susan. "The First Sophists and the Uses of History." Rhetoric Review 6 (1987): 67-77.
  • Jarratt, Susan C. Rereading the Sophists: Classical Rhetoric Refigured . Carbondale and Edwardsville: Southern Illinois University Press, 1991.
  • Kennedy, George. The Art of Persuasion in Greece. Princeton N.J.: Princeton University, 1963.
  • Kerferd, G.B. "The First Greek Sophists." Classical Review 64 (1950): 8-10.
  • Marias, Julian. History of Philosophy. New York: Dover, 1967.
  • Maritain, Jacques. Introduction to Philosophy. Westminster MD: Christian Classics, 1991.
  • McComiskey, Bruce. Gorgias and the New Sophistic Rhetoric. Carbondale: Southern Illinois, 2002.
  • Plato. Gorgias. Trans. Robin Waterford. Oxford: Oxford, 1994.
  • Poulakos, John. Sophistical Rhetoric in Classical Greece. Columbia: University Of South Carolina, 1995.
  • Schiappa, Edward. "Sophistic Rhetoric: Oasis or Mirage?" Rhetoric Review 10 (1991):5-18.
  • Sprague, Rosamund Kent, ed. The Older Sophists. Columbia: University of South Carolina, 1972.

Author Information

C. Francis Higgins
University of Louisiana Lafayette
U. S. A.

Huineng (Hui-neng) (638—713)

HuinengHuineng (Hui-neng) a seminal figure in Buddhist history. He is the famous “Sixth Patriarch” of the Chan or meditation tradition, which is better known in Japanese as "Zen"). The focus of an immense body of lore that grew over the centuries, Huineng’s life mirrors the fortunes of Chan itself – a provincial Chinese version of Buddhism that rose to become a major religious and cultural force throughout East Asia. Tradition holds that Huineng was an uncouth “barbarian” youth who, because of his innate intuitive insight, surpassed his more cultured fellow monks to earn the official “dharma seal” certifying the authoritative transmission of Buddhist enlightenment, and thereby earning a lasting place in history. He is intimately associated with the Platform Sutra of the Sixth Patriarch, one of the most influential texts in all of Chinese Buddhism. Alleged to be a sermon from the lips of Huineng himself, this text provides a gripping first person account of the Master’s life. Its cryptic, yet insightful, discussion of Chan practice lays out the central concerns of Chan cultivation. Huineng’s discussion of the themes of inherent enlightenment, sudden awakening, and the non-dual nature of wisdom (Sanskrit: prajna) and meditation (Sanskrit: dhyana) resounds through later generations of Chan teachers, and continues to pose difficult philosophical challenges to this day.

Table of Contents

  1. Chan Buddhism in Context
  2. Biography
  3. Historical Issues and Mythic Elements
  4. Central Teachings
    1. Major Themes
      1. Original/Inherent Enlightenment (ben jue)
      2. Non-duality
      3. No-thought (wu nian)
      4. Sudden Awakening (dun wu)
      5. The Centrality of Practice
    2. Teaching Style
  5. Influences
  6. Critical Issues
    1. The Role of Reason and Rationality
    2. Sudden vs. Gradual?
    3. The Role of Text (wen) in Life
    4. The Relation of Action (praxis) and Knowledge (theoria)
    5. The Centrality of Ritual (Li)
  7. Impact on Later Buddhist and Chinese Philosophical Traditions
  8. References and Further Reading

1. Chan Buddhism in Context

It is impossible to disentangle Huineng from the story of early Chan. Indeed, it is in sections 49-51 of the Platform Sutra that Huineng lays out the classic story of Chan’s origins. According to this account, Chan began with the historical Buddha, Sakyamuni, and his famous “Flower Sermon.” One day the Buddha took his seat before his assembled monks and, instead of speaking, remained silent while holding a single flower aloft in his hand. Of those assembled, only one disciple Mahakashyapa (Sanskrit: “Great Kashyapa”), understood the meaning of the Buddha’s actions. The Buddha publicly recognized Mahakashyapa’s realization and he, in turn, passed the wordless teaching along to his disciples. Eventually the transmission passed to a certain Bodhidharma (c. 470-553 CE), the infamous “First Patriarch,” who, it is said, brought Chan to southern China, crossing the Yangzi (Yangtze) River on a reed. Recent scholarship has established that a mysterious figure named Bodhidharma was indeed in southern China in the fifth century proclaiming teachings based on the Lankavatara Sutra as well as a simplified but powerful form of dhyana. After his death his disciples carried on his teachings, but most of them never founded lasting lineages. Eventually these teachings were transmitted to Hongren (600-674), the Fifth Patriarch, who taught at Dongshan. Hongren had a number of disciples who spread out through China, establishing their own schools where they taught their own versions of Chan. Some died out but a few flourished, going on to record their histories to establish their particular pedigrees.

Often dubbed “the meditation school,” Chan derives its name from the Chinese term channa, an attempted transliteration of the Sanskrit term dhyana (meditation, concentration). In Japan, it is known as Zen; in Korea, as Son; and in Vietnam, as Thien. In India, dhyana encompassed a wide variety of techniques for training the mind to attain the deep insight into reality necessary for awakening. When Buddhism began making inroads into China in the first and second centuries CE, missionaries brought these techniques with them. Dhyana study proved popular in some circles – in part because of its resemblance to Daoist meditation practices – but it was just one practice alongside of others, such as sutra study, devotional rituals and the performance of charitable works. Only later did Chan become a self-conscious movement with a firm institutional base.

By the sixth century, certain monasteries in the mountainous areas of central and southwestern China became known as places reserved for intense meditation training. The masters at these centers taught methods so powerful that it was rumored that those willing to persevere could awaken in this very life. As time went on several of these meditation masters gained loyal followings and tales of them spread as their disciples established their own monasteries. It was out of this context that Chan as a distinct school (zong, “lineage”) and the legend of its most famous master arose. Modern scholars now agree that many of the stories surrounding Huineng are “mythical” reconstructions and elaborations by later generations of Chan writers. Nonetheless, this mythology tells us a lot about how Chan came to conceive itself as a distinct tradition, at once radically innovative and deeply conservative. This Chan self-conception finds its best articulation in a poem attributed to Bodhidharma, according to which Chan is “a separate transmission outside the scriptures, not relying on words and phrases, directly transmitted from mind to mind.” Such transmission can only occur within the relationship between Master and student; hence, the Master, and the connection to him, is of paramount importance in all Chan schools.

2. Biography

As with many legendary figures, it is difficult to sort fact from fiction when it comes to Huineng. We have many sources of information on him but most were written long after his lifetime. Most scholars of Buddhism now consider the story of Huineng’s life and his role in establishing Chan as a direct line going back to Sakyamuni (the historical Buddha, ca. 6th to 5th centuries BCE) to be little more than pious fiction. While there may be a kernel of historical truth to them, all of the accounts of Huineng’s life (particularly as recorded in the Platform Sutra of the Sixth Patriarch) show evidence of later expansion and elaboration. In fact, scholars cannot even agree on the location of Dafan, the temple in which Huineng allegedly recited the Platform Sutra.

The earliest mention of Huineng comes from an inscription for a memorial pagoda in Faxing monastery dated 676. The pagoda was said to commemorate Huineng’s meeting with master Yinzong (627-713), a devotee of the Nirvana Sutra and a renowned master of monastic discipline (vinaya), and the ceremony in which Huineng underwent monastic tonsure, that is, shaving of part of the head. Unfortunately, the actual inscription has not been preserved and so many historians deem it unreliable. The only other record dating back to Huineng’s lifetime just lists him as a student of the Chan master Hongren (Hong-jen).

Later records, of which there are many, probably bear little resemblance to real historical events, and actually contradict each other on certain details. Later traditions concerning Huineng vary tremendously. He seems to go into hiding for several years only to reappear in Nanhai at a monastery presided over by Yinzong. One day after the Master had finished a lecture, Huineng overheard two monks arguing over whether the temple flag or the wind was moving. Huineng abruptly injected himself into this discussion, declaring that in fact it was mind that was moving. Hearing of this, Yinzong sent for Huineng and, bowing to him, asked to be taught the dharma of Hongren. It was Yinzong who oversaw the giving of the tonsure to Huineng, the incident memorialized in the inscription mentioned above. Eventually most accounts of Huineng’s life have him retiring to the Baolin temple. Some traditions speak of Huineng being summoned to the imperial capital by the emperor Zhongzong or possibly the empress Wu Zhao (ca. 625-706). In any case, Huineng declined, preferring to spend his days in the mountains and forests preaching the dharma. He did, however, give the imperial envoy a dharma talk that jolted the messenger into an intense sudden realization. Returning to the capital the envoy reported his experience to the emperor who issued an edict praising Huineng and bestowing special gifts upon him.

Our major source for information on Huineng is the autobiographical portion (sections 2-11) of the Platform Sutra of the Sixth Patriarch, an immensely complicated text that has undergone numerous revisions over the centuries. Purporting to be a series of sermons delivered by Huineng from a high seat in the lecture hall (the “platform” alluded to in the title) of Dafan Temple, this text remains the only Chinese Buddhist discourse to be accorded sutra (Sanskrit: “scriptural”) status. The earliest extant copy of this sutra, found in a cache of writings discovered in the Dunhuang (Tun-huang) caves in northwestern China, dates to around 850 but it is corrupt and full of errors – probably the result of being copied from an earlier version by a semiliterate scribe. The first section of the text names Fahai, a student of Huineng’s, as transcribing the sermon at the behest of the district governor. Elsewhere the text names Fahai as one of the Master’s ten disciples and “chief monk” of the community. However, Fahai does not appear anywhere else in Chan literature and his exact identity remains unknown. Some scholars suggest the sutra was actually written by a later Chan monk from a different school (possibly the Niutou or “Ox-head” school) around the year 780.

While most scholars do not put much stock in either the Platform Sutra or the other sources on Huineng’s life, we can still use them to piece together something of a biography for him. It seems his family name was Lu and his father had been a minor official who was banished to the provinces where he died when his son was only three. His mother took him to southern China and raised him in extreme poverty. Huineng worked throughout his childhood to support his family by cutting wood. One day when he was a young man, he overheard a man reciting a phrase from the Diamond Sutra and at once he experienced an initial awakening. With his mother’s permission he left home and devoted himself to religious life.

Huineng spent his next years wandering, ending up with a Buddhist nun who was devoted to the Nirvana Sutra. After reciting passages from it one day she asked him to take a turn reading it aloud only to find that he was illiterate. Incredulous, she asked how he intended to learn Buddha’s truth if he could not read the sutras. The youth replied that the nature of Buddha does not depend on words and letters so what need was there to read texts? Amazed at his insight, she suggested he take up monastic life. At this point he declined, but went on to train under a meditation master.

After three years of meditating in a mountain cave, Huineng went to Dongshan (East Mountain) monastery in Hubei, where he met Master Hongren, the “Fifth Patriarch.” Glaring at this supplicant, Hongren asked where he was from and why he was there. Huineng answered simply that he was from the south and had come to learn the dharma (Buddhist doctrine) from him. Hongren retorted that as a southerner, Huineng was a mere “barbarian,” adding, “How could you become Buddha?” Unfazed by the insult, Huineng replied, “Although my ‘barbarian’ body and yours differ, what difference is there in our buddha-nature?” Realizing at once the potential of this coarse youth, Hongren resolved to test him further. He took him in but assigned him to the threshing room, where he labored for nine months, treading the mill to separate the rice grains from their husks.

The most famous incident in Huineng’s story concerns a dharma contest. One day Hongren challenged his charges to each write a verse (gatha) distilling their understanding of their “original natures.” He promised to read them and award his robe (a symbol of dharma transmission; some versions of the story include Hongren’s begging bowl) and the title “Sixth Patriarch” to the student demonstrating true realization. The task quickly devolved onto the shoulders of the head monk, Shenxiu, who, it was assumed, would be the Master’s likely successor. Shenxiu, however, was full of doubt and spent a tortured night considering his options. Finally he stole out and wrote his verse anonymously on the wall of the new dharma hall:

The body is the bodhi tree.
The heart-mind is like a mirror.
Moment by moment wipe and polish it,
Not allowing dust to collect. (section 6)

A straightforward articulation of the necessity of diligent practice, Shenxiu hoped this verse would show the Master that his students had at least some understanding.

The next morning Hongren read the verse and praised it before the community. He burned incense before it and ordered them all to recite it before calling Shenxiu for an interview. In private he commended Shenxiu for his insight, stating that the verse showed he had reached the “gates of wisdom” but had yet to enter. He then suggested Shenxiu take a few more days to compose another verse worthy of being awarded the robe.

Meanwhile, Huineng was still working in the threshing room when a novice wandered by reciting Shenxiu’s verse. Immediately Huineng realized the author of the verse lacked full understanding. Venturing out to the dharma hall, he got someone to write his reply:

Bodhi originally has no tree.
The clear and bright mirror also has no support.
Buddha-nature is constantly purifying and clearing.
Where could there be dust? (section 8)

Very soon word of this new verse spread and eventually the news reached Hongren. The Master came to read it and immediately recognized it as the work of Huineng and that this unknown prodigy was truly enlightened. However, he knew that passing his robe to an uncouth peasant would upset the monastic hierarchy. Therefore he publicly dismissed it as “not complete understanding.” Later, under cover of darkness, Hongren summoned Huineng for a secret audience in which he gave him further teachings. Passing on his robe, the Master admonished him to flee for his life, predicting, however, that eventually he would transmit the teachings. With that, Huineng fled south. After some months, Huineng was traced to a mountain by a band of pursuers intent on killing him and stealing the robe. Most of the pursuers turned back after climbing only halfway but one, Huiming (a former general) reached him on the summit. There, rather than slay the young master, he received the teaching and became enlightened. Thus being recognized as a true Chan Master, Huineng dispatched his new disciple to the north to spread the dharma and convert the populace.

One of the most colorful episodes in Huineng lore concerns his confrontation with a dragon that lived in a pond in front of Baolin temple. The dragon was particularly large and fierce, emerging regularly from the watery depths to create havoc and instill fear in the populace. Fearlessly, the Master taunted the beast for its weakness at only being unable to appear in a large as opposed to smaller form. At once the dragon disappeared only to re-emerge in small form and so show the monk his powers. Unimpressed, the Master challenged the monster to show its courage by entering his bowl. When it did so, the Master quickly scooped the dragon up, took him into the Buddha Hall, and preached dharma to it until it shed its body and departed.

Much as with other great religious figures, so the stories of Huineng’s death are particularly dramatic. The Platform Sutra gives a confused account that may combine several different versions. In essence, however, it records that as he neared his death, the Master called his disciples for a final teaching in the form of a “dharma verse.” All the disciples broke into tears over the imminent departure of their beloved teacher except for one, Shenhui, whom the Master praised for having attained the status of awakening. Chiding the others for the foolishness of their tears, Huineng told them, “All of you sit down. I shall give you a verse, the verse of the true-false moving-quiet. All of you recite it, and if you understand the meaning, you will be the same as I. If you practice with it, you will not lose the essence of the teaching.” (section 48) After this final lesson (during which he outlined the Chan lineage back to the Buddha) Huineng died at the stroke of midnight on August 28, 713. Other traditions, however, have Huineng dying in deep meditation after finishing his last meal. His passing was marked by all manner of cosmic signs: a strange perfume pervading the temple for days, mysterious bright lights, a miraculous rainbow in the sky etc. The Platform Sutra says, “Mountains crumbled, the earth trembled, and the forest trees turned white. The sun and moon ceased to shine and the wind and clouds lost their colors.” (section 54) An inscription by the poet Wang Wei (d. 759) adds “the birds and monkeys cried in anguish.”

Several posthumous stories of Huineng attest to the powerful spell he cast on later generations. Some decades after his passing the emperor sent an envoy to ask for his robe and bowl so that the court might pay them homage. These were sent back with great ceremony a few years later by the succeeding emperor, who purportedly dreamt Huineng asked that they be returned. Later, in 816, Huineng was awarded the official title “Dhyana Master Dajian” (Great Mirror). To this day there is a mummy reputed to be Huineng in the Nanhua monastery located in Caoxi. For centuries it was the focus of intense devotion, and at times was brought to the nearby city of Shanzhou to promote prosperity or ward off plagues and droughts. The mummy was also threatened several times and at least one time was nearly decapitated by rival monks seeking to gain power through possession of the Sixth Patriarch’s head.

3. Historical Issues and Mythic Elements

Historical complexities aside, however, it is the mythic dimensions of Huineng’s story that most excite the imagination. Certainly the traditional account is replete with symbolism and allusion. As a boy Huineng is the quintessential simpleton (cf. the Daoist notion of pu, “simplicity” or “the uncarved block” spoken of in Daode jing 15, 19, 28, 32, 37, 57), an illiterate peasant who, pure and unspoiled by the sophistication of his more educated fellows, serves as the perfect vessel for receiving the sacred wisdom that, in turn, flows through him to posterity. Aside from the allusions to Daode jing just noted, Huineng epitomizes the ideal found in Daode jing 70, “The sage goes about with a coarse cloth on top yet carries jade in his bosom.” We find similar themes in stories of other Buddhist figures (for example, Dao’an, 312-385) as well as the Prophet Muhammad. The tradition of Huineng’s being orphaned and cared for by his mother echoes the biography of Mencius (ca. 385-312 BCE), one of the most revered and mystical of Confucian sages.

Huineng’s potential is recognized by the truly wise (for example, Hongren) but he must first be tested to prove his worth. His assignment to hard labor for nine months in seclusion suggests a type of spiritual gestation. Moreover, Huineng’s attaining official recognition under cover of darkness, symbolized in the passing on of Bodhidharma’s robe and bowl (sacred relics imbued with the Patriarch’s charisma), underscores the drama of this moment and the immense value of his precious wisdom. The tradition that these were buried with him indicates something else of importance: Huineng’s successors would no longer rely on India; Chan would henceforth be a homegrown Chinese tradition. Huineng’s turning down the imperial summons recalls the similar story involving Zhuangzi wherein the Daoist sage prefers to live as a turtle, “dragging his tail in the mud” (Zhuangzi, chapter 17). Finally, the accounts of Huineng’s death clearly echo the earthly passing (parinirvana) of Sakyamuni Buddha. Symbolically, Chan tradition, by drawing such a wide assortment of sacred figures into Huineng’s own story, has effectively absorbed these holy personages’ collective mana. As such, Chan is then empowered to project this “new” sacred aura down through its own lineage.

We can also understand the traditional story of Huineng’s life as an example of the apparently universal “Hero Myth.” He starts off as an unpromising youth living in obscurity who embarks on a great quest. Along the way he is aided by various helpers (the anonymous man who recited the Diamond Sutra, the nun devoted to the Nirvana Sutra, his first meditation teacher). After various adventures he meets a true mentor, the Wise Old Man (Hongren), who recognizes his worth and proceeds to train and test him until he is ready. Then the Wise Old Man passes on the secret knowledge he will need to face all obstacles. The climactic story of Huineng’s flight, pursuit, confrontation on mountain top, and his victory all fit in broad outline the structure of such tales the world over. His encounter with the dragon, of course, is the stereotypical battle with the monster (cf. St. George and the Dragon, Beowulf and Grendel) through which the Hero saves society from the threat of evil and chaos, while his refusal of imperial status demonstrates his humility and desire to avoid self-glorification. In this light, the master’s death marks his apotheosis and rise to divine status, for which he is revered by later generations.

When assessing the life of Huineng and his place in Chan lore, it is vital to bear in mind the centrality of lineage in Chinese culture. Lineage is a primary marker of group identity and solidarity, as well as social recognition. Chan, like other Chinese religious/philosophical traditions, is organized as a system of lineages in which teachings are passed down from Master (Patriarch) to disciple, much as family heritage passes down from father to son. The concern for lineage is most evident in sections 49-51 of the Platform Sutra, where Huineng traces the transmission of his teachings back through various masters to Bodhidharma. In Huineng’s Chan genealogy, Bodhidharma, in turn, received the teachings via a series of Indian masters going back to Sakyamuni. Such an impressive pedigree no doubt brought much prestige to those within the Chan line. The importance of lineage continued through the succeeding generations and was carried over when Chan went to Japan. To this day, Chan teachers trace their lineage back to Huineng. Essentially, Huineng has become the Primary Ancestor of the Chan line, receiving the reverence and devotion typical of ancestral cults throughout East Asia. Metaphorically speaking, Huineng is Chan, and remains so even today.

Such critical analysis of the Platform Sutra and the body of lore surrounding Huineng is not intended to dismiss Chan tradition (particularly in regards to the matter of lineage) as fraudulent. Rather, it helps us understand the concerns of early Chan and the vital role that a charismatic hero such as Huineng plays in rhetorically establishing a distinctive Chan identity. For an analogy we can look to the way in which the great Song scholar Zhu Xi (1130-1200) constructs a lineage for his school of Neo-Confucianism, with Confucius taking the place of Huineng and Master Zhu serving as the Confucian version of Shenhui.

4. Central Teachings

Although Huineng’s mythic biography is fascinating, the Platform Sutra mainly consists of an extended series of dharma talks offering what is at times some rather cryptic advice on Chan cultivation. Like most sermons, the Sutra is not a systematic presentation of defined doctrines and arguments but is an address to the faithful, exhorting them to see into their “original nature” and awaken here and now. Huineng explicitly says that his teachings do not originate with him but are, “handed down from the sages of the past” (section 12). Nonetheless, Huineng does introduce several important ideas and initiates the peculiar style of teaching that comes to be enshrined in later Chan tradition. These teachings tend to overlap and interlock with each other, thereby suggesting the unity-cum-diversity that is one of the hallmarks of Chan thought.

a. Major Themes

i. Original/Inherent Enlightenment (ben jue)

The teaching of “inherent” or “original” enlightenment is a major theme in Huineng’s sermon, and the theoretical basis for most of what he says regarding practice. Its roots go back to Indian teachings concerning the tathagata-garbha (“womb/embryo of Buddha”). Although a complex notion, essentially this teaching comes down to a positive articulation of basic Buddhist views on emptiness (shunyata) and the thoroughly interrelated nature of existence. According to tathagata-garbha teachings, although all beings are mired in ignorance and suffering, our true natures are always pure and luminous – defilements are merely adventitious. Awakening occurs when we pierce through the defilements and allow our original purity to shine forth. While at first glance, the assertion of a seemingly permanent “nature” would seem to contradict the fundamental Buddhist doctrine of anatman (“no [permanent] self”), in fact it does not. The tathagata-garbha is not a substantive essence but an indication of the innate positive tendency towards awakening that is always directly at hand.

Tathagata-garbha teachings had strong appeal for the Chinese, most likely due to their resonance with Confucian ideas of “propriety” (yi, the appropriate manner of acting in a given situation) and humanity’s innate “goodness,” as well as Daoist views of the Way (dao), in which each thing uniquely contributes to the all-encompassing system of the cosmos. These notions also dovetail with the traditional Chinese concern with one’s “nature” (xing, the inborn organic pattern guiding a thing’s development). Together such ideas sketch out a distinctive worldview of dynamic, interactive relationships that unfold in the natural course of things. In this perspective, one can obstruct one’s inherent tendencies or open conscientiously into a more free and responsive way of engagement. In general, the latter is the truer, more proper (or “natural”) way of being. Chinese Buddhists speak of this potential for realization as one’s “Buddha-nature” (fo xing). For Chinese Buddhists, awakening is the natural result of activating or “seeing into” this innate but hidden potential and manifesting it here and now.

Nearly everything Huineng says is predicated on the “Buddha-nature.” We see this clearly in his youthful exchanges with both the nameless Buddhist nun and Master Hongren. Huineng drives this point home in a number of places, often quite explicitly. As he proclaims, “Since Buddha is made by your own nature, do not look for him outside your body. If you are deluded in your own nature, Buddha is then a sentient being; if you are awakened in your own natures, sentient beings are then Buddhas.” (section 35) In this understanding of Buddhahood, one may have an initial awakening (Japanese satori) but this is only a hurried glimpse, yet it provides a vague understanding that spurs one on further – something we clearly see in Huineng’s own life with his first awakening at hearing a passage from the Diamond Sutra.

By rhetorically taking his stand on this inherent enlightenment, Huineng challenges his audience to understand this truth and realize their original natures where they are at this very moment. This is something they can and must do: “Despite heterodox views, passions, ignorance, and delusions, in your own physical bodies you have in yourselves the attributes of inherent enlightenment, so that with correct views you can be saved.” (section 21) It is on this basis that he speaks of such things as the unity of meditation (dhyana) and wisdom (prajna), and the “samadhi of oneness. By realizing one’s “Buddha-nature” one naturally moves beyond habitual “selfish” actions and joining with things in an appropriate and compassionate way.

ii. Non-duality

Another important theme that Huineng preaches concerns the fundamentally “non-dual” nature of existence. This, too, is prone to be misunderstood. Huineng never espouses a mushy notion that “All is One” so much as challenge the assumption that a person stands apart from her/his immediate situation. His target is the self-conscious sense of separation that tends to arise out of deliberative thinking and living. Thus, his focus is not so much theoretical as practical; one must not get caught up in speculative thought but realize (make real) Buddha, one’s true nature, and act accordingly. This fundamental unity comes through in his famous dharma verse through which he won Hongren’s robe. By countering Shenxiu’s verse and its assumptions of duality, Huineng graphically tells us that we must not think of our minds as something distinct that “we” must polish to reflect truth. Rather, we are truth, immediately and directly.

The vision Huineng seeks to impart is one of integrity within our larger context. It is an evocation of wholeness, interrelatedness and participation rather than separation and distinction. One of Huineng’s most provocative presentations of this idea comes in his discussion of meditation. For Huineng, meditation is not a separate “thing” from wisdom, nor do you attain the latter by way of the former. As he says, “Never under any circumstances say mistakenly that meditation and wisdom are different; they are a unity, not two things. Meditation itself is the substance of wisdom; wisdom itself is the function of meditation” (section 13). Later, the Patriarch explains their relationship through the analogy of a lamp and its light: just as the lamp and its illuminating are essentially one, so meditation and wisdom are one.

Huineng also challenges assumptions of separation by advocating the “samadhi of oneness,” or concentrated attention to the present situation: “The samadhi of oneness is straightforward mind at all times, walking, staying, sitting, and lying.” This constitutes an intriguing practice of mindful, meditative action performed with attentive detachment. There are obvious echoes between this practice and the Daoist notion of wei wuwei (“acting without acting”) as well as path of karma yoga outlined by Krishna in the Bhagavad-Gita, and Chan communities to this day seek to instill such an approach to life throughout their daily regimen.

This fundamental unity of existence that one manifests by realizing one’s “Buddha-nature” also informs Huineng’s view of the Pure Land (the “Western Paradise”) which, following the Vimalakirti Sutra (where the Buddha shows his disciples that this world is the Pure Land for those with Pure Mind), he refuses to allow us to conceive the Pure Land as something separate from our current existence. It is, rather, the straightforward mind of the “samadhi of oneness.” In attaining this state of true purity, one finds no obstructions. Or, as Huineng puts it, “If inside and outside are clear, this will be no different from the Western Land” (section 35).

iii. No-thought (wu nian)

Huineng speaks from the standpoint of Ultimate Truth (the inherent “Buddha-nature”) the non-dual reality lying beyond our everyday unenlightened experience of separation and division. To awaken to this Truth, Huineng emphasizes “non-clinging” to any verbal teachings, which only present obstacles to True Awakening. Instead, Huineng stresses the perspective of “no-thought” (wu nian), an open, non-conceptual state of mind that allows one to experience reality directly, as it truly is. As he states, “No thought is not to think even when involved in thought. . . To be unstained in all environments is called no-thought. If on the basis of your own thoughts you separate from environment, then, in regard to things, thoughts are not produced. If you stop thinking of the myriad things, and cast aside all thoughts, as soon as one instant of thought is cut off, you will be reborn in another realm.” (section 13)

Note that Huineng explicitly says “no-thought” is not a state of insentiency, nor is it a way of valorizing irrational, “thoughtless” behavior. Rather, “no-thought” is a highly attentive yet unentangled way of being -- seemingly the only genuine freedom available. Those who act from the perspective of “no-thought” respond compassionately in all situations, untouched by suffering, much the same way the Mahayana scriptures speak of bodhisattvas (enlightened beings who selflessly seek to aid others) who “course in the Perfection of Wisdom.”

iv. Sudden Awakening (dun wu)

Few ideas are so closely associated with Huineng’s Chan than “sudden awakening” (dun wu). Rooted in earlier Buddhist and Daoist teachings, it primarily referred to statements of truth a sage made in relationship to specific audiences. Those that were direct and profound were given to those ready for such a “sudden” dose of reality whereas those that were more indirect and metaphorical were provided for those who needed to be led “gradually.” The difference, thus, lies in those who receive the teachings rather than the actual content of the teachings. Some are, as it were, closer to their “Buddha-nature.” According to later Chan tradition, Huineng advocated the (superior) way of “sudden awakening” in contrast to Shenxiu, whose dharma verse clearly points to the (inferior) way of “gradual awakening.”

This polemical distinction, however, does not capture Huineng’s full meaning. The term dun, typically translated as “sudden,” might better be rendered as “poised” or “ready” for some great undertaking Those who experience such “sudden awakening” are those who are “keen” and “fast,” ready to awaken in action, poised to break through to fuller, wise and compassionate living. By contrast, those who are “dull” are “slow,” not quite as prepared or attentive to respond in so wise a fashion. Equally as important, moreover, is Huineng’s insistence that from the standpoint of the “Buddha-nature,” there is no “sudden” or “gradual.” Thus he notes, “The dharma itself is the same, but in seeing it there is a slow way and a fast way. Seen slowly, it is the gradual; seen fast it is the sudden [teaching]. Dharma is without sudden or gradual, but some people are keen and others dull; hence the names ‘sudden’ and ‘gradual.’” (section 39)

v. The Centrality of Practice

In many respects the necessity of practice may be the single most important refrain in Huineng’s sermons. Huineng repeatedly emphasizes that Chan life, awakening, is not attained through study or careful deliberation but live action. One of the best instances comes immediately after he explains what seated meditation (zuochan; Japanese zazen) is: “Good friends, see for yourselves the purity of your own natures, practice and accomplish for yourselves. Your own nature is the Dharmakaya [“Body of the Teaching,” the Ultimate Truth] and self-practice is the practice of Buddha; by self-accomplishment you may achieve the Buddha Way for yourselves.” (section 19)

To achieve Buddhahood one must be Buddha, that which, paradoxically, one always already is. Such awakened living cannot be adequately explained through words so much as demonstrated and acted upon. In this sense, one learns it directly by conforming to an already established pattern, internalizing it, and then acting this out in any given situation. An analogy might be learning to play a musical instrument or another activity such as riding a bicycle. Chan practice is Chan doing, something that can only be learned through careful imitation of a living example – one’s Master. It is this type of first-hand learning to which Bodhidharma refers in his famous verse: “A special transmission outside the scriptures; not dependent on words and letters.”

Ironically, despite his constant injunctions to wise action, Huineng provides little detail on the specifics of practice. As a result, scholars are unsure what sorts of actual practices were taught in early Chan communities. This silence on specifics, however, turned out to be a point in Huineng’s favor, as his injunctions could readily be applied to a wide variety of Chan styles through the ages.

b. Teaching Style

Huineng’s presentation in the Platform Sutra pioneered Chan’s distinct teaching style that makes use of paradox and cryptic statements aimed at jolting students out of their habitual discursive reasoning. By no means, of course, is Huineng the inventor of such discourse (it is very common in Buddhist and Daoist texts) but in the Platform Sutra Huineng uses it with uncanny skill. As such, it warrants close examination.

One of the most significant features of Huineng’s discourse is its overwhelmingly dialogical character. Although it has its share of lectures, this “sermon” is more often a series of exchanges between Huineng and various interlocutors. Such a literary form calls for one to shift perspective back and forth. Like normal conversation, so a dialogue also tends to lead one beyond the immediate horizon, inviting listeners (and readers) to come along. Dialogue is a common form in Western philosophy (most notably in Plato’s dialogues) yet there is also ample precedent in both Buddhist and Chinese literature. The Perfection of Wisdom Sutras, the primary scriptures of Mahayana Buddhism, are all extended dialogues between the Buddha and his disciples, while most of the Analects and the Zhuangzi are dialogues as well. The dialogue is a powerful rhetorical form, dramatic and challenging, one that demands a response from its audience.

One of the more common rhetorical forms in Buddhism is paradox, and Huineng certainly makes use of this in his teaching. Thus, for instance, he admonishes his students, “Do not depart from deceptions and errors; for they of themselves are the nature of True Reality” (section 27). Later when on the point of death, he takes his closest disciples to task for their ignorance by saying, “All of you sit down. I shall give you a verse, the verse of the true-false moving-quiet.” (section 48) There is something very tricky in such sayings, as they are seemingly contradictory if not absurd. The point of a paradox, of course, is that such absurdity is only apparent for the paradox masks a higher truth that we must divine ourselves. As such, paradox is a highly suggestive form of rhetoric, one that presents us with a basic tension, leaving it for us to resolve.

Huineng also engages in a great deal of polemics in the Platform Sutra. For example, he continually contrasts the “wise” with the “deluded.” He also draws a sharp contrast between his teachings and those of the “Northern school” (secs. 37, 39, 48-49), criticizes a student whose “practice” consists of only reciting the Lotus Sutra (sec. 42), and even converts a “spy” who seems to have come to discredit him (secs. 40-41). While a polemical style may have negative connotations it also serves several rhetorical purposes. To begin, it sets the Master and his audience apart from others, thereby emphasizing that this teaching is different or special. It also underscores the challenging nature of the teaching, and no doubt directly counters various preconceived ideas in the audience. Indeed, it may even put his disciples and audience on the defensive, thus setting them up psychologically for a deeper breakthrough.

All in all, Huineng’s teaching style is quite challenging. At times it is highly provocative, even maddening. He does not lay his subjects out neatly so that his audience can absorb what he says with ease but jars his listeners to elicit a reaction from them. His words, thus, are inherently unstable and elusive, pouring forth quixotically. They resist final definition and closure, similar to Zhuangzi’s “goblet words” (zhi yan, cf. Zhuangzi chapter 27) or what the fifth century Buddhist thinker Sengzhao terms “wild words” (kuan yan, cf. his essay “Panruo Wuzhi”). Such stylistic considerations, in the end, suggest that the ultimate message of Huineng’s sermon may not be so much what he says as how he says it and how we take up his words in our response.

5. Influences

As noted above, Huineng himself claims that nothing in his teachings originates with him, much as Confucius does in Analects 15.28. Clearly, what he iterates in the Platform Sutra derives from earlier works and there are many times when he makes explicit references to other texts, notably the Diamond, Vimalakirti, and Lotus Sutras. In addition, we should also mention the Nirvana Sutra, a text promoting the universality of the “Buddha-nature” that had a profound influence on Chinese Buddhism as a whole. The influences, however, go far beyond this short list. Huineng demonstrates knowledge of the great body of Prajna-paramita (Perfection of Wisdom) literature (of which the Diamond Sutra is one rather late example), as well as the techniques of the Madhyamika school – notably in the negation of set positions, dialectic play between “conventional” and “Ultimate” truth, and the constant challenge to any attempts at a final articulation of Buddhist truth. In addition, at certain points he reveals a basic familiarity with Pure Land doctrine (sec. 35) and some rather technical aspects of Abhidharma and Yogacara philosophy (sec. 45)

Moreover, Huineng’s teachings and style of presentation also owe a great deal to indigenous Chinese sources. This is most obvious when it comes to Daoism, as Huineng’s character and actions so often epitomize teachings found in both the Daode jing and the Zhuangzi. As for Confucian tradition, Huineng makes an obvious bow to Confucius in presenting himself as a transmitter, while his adherence to the positive power of “Buddha nature” owes at least something to the Mencian idea of “inherent goodness” of human nature, a perennial theme in Chinese philosophy that finds one of its most popular articulations in the Zhongyong (“Doctrine of the Mean”). Other scholars have even suggested that portions of the Platform Sutra may have been compiled under the influence of the Yijing.

The fact that Huineng quotes passages from such a large body of works and that scholars can so-easily discern other literary influences and allusions constitutes further proof that the tradition of Huineng’s illiteracy should not be taken literally. In the Platform Sutra Huineng proves rather erudite, if not bookish. His familiarity with so much of his Buddhist and Chinese heritage challenges stereotypes of Chan as denigrating and even ignoring written texts. Indeed, scholars of Buddhism often point out the ironic fact that Chan, so often known for its dismissal of texts, has the largest body of written work of any East Asian Buddhist tradition. Furthermore, many great Chan masters (for example, Dogen, 1200-1253) were brilliant scholars and original thinkers. This paradoxical aspect of Chan, rather than being the product of centuries of institutionalization as some might claim, seems to have been there from the very beginning.

6. Critical Issues

Although the Platform Sutra is most unusual for a “philosophical” text, both in terms of style and content it raises a number of issues that are of particular philosophic import.

a. The Role of Reason and Rationality

Chan has a reputation for irrationality, allegedly insisting that practitioners cut off thinking entirely. There is some basis for such views, and in Chan history we do find examples where this seems to have been encouraged, as, for example, in the case of the Baotang school of Chan that developed in Sichuan during eighth century. Huineng and most Chan masters, however, do not advocate a disorderly or irrational lifestyle. Their concern, instead, seems to be on the predominance of ratio (deliberative, analytic thinking) and the discursive reasoning that severs aspects of reality into discrete bits, usually from an egocentric standpoint. From a Chan perspective, this mode of understanding is the result of a highly artificial process that cuts one off from full participation in one’s immediate context and inevitably leads to suffering. Such an approach cannot be countered with rational, objective arguments because such reasoning is itself a product of such a mode of understanding. By breaking the grip of such processes on humanity, Huineng and his later followers seek to free us for a fuller, more natural life, and hence a truer life.

Much of the difficulty surrounding this subject stems from Chan’s distinctive rhetorical style, of which Huineng is a true master. In particular the notion of “no-thought” seems to suggest a sort of mindless, purely instinctual response or perhaps even unconsciousness. Certainly, “no-thought” is not rational in the sense of bare objectivity. In fact, as we have seen, “no-thought” is not this at all but more like an attitude of carefully attentiveness to the situation at hand. If “no-thought” is lacking in anything it would be the self-consciousness that typically arises out of the dualism inherent in subject-object thinking. Most assuredly “no-thought” should not be equated with becoming insentient, that is, an “object” among others.

Is there a place for reason in all this? Not in the ordinary sense. However, Chan would seem to be less “irrational” than “a rational,” although such labels themselves are designations arising within discursive reasoning. In the end, it may be helpful to view Huineng as espousing a type of “philosophy as propaganda,” much like Nagarjuna or the later Wittgenstein. The aim is not to argue but to change one’s way of thinking in favor of a more immediate and direct way of being.

b. Sudden vs. Gradual?

Much has been made of this notion in Chan scholarship and, indeed, Chan tradition often presents the as a conflict of “Northern Chan Gradualism” and “Southern Chan Subitism” – an alleged conflict from which the latter emerged victorious. In reality it is not really so simple, but the contrast points to an instable dynamic that lies at the heart of Buddhism and perhaps all spiritual practice. If “sudden awakening” refers to an instantaneous experience of enlightenment at which point nothing more needs to be done, then why did someone like Huineng continue to sit in meditation through his later years and exhort his students to do the same even after his death (section 53)?

In fact, what Huineng says about the contrast between “sudden” and “gradual” is anything but clear: “Good friends, in the dharma there is no sudden or gradual, but among people some are keen and others dull. The deluded recommend the gradual method, the enlightened practice the sudden teaching. . . Once enlightened, there is from the outset no distinction between these two methods; those who are not enlightened with for long kalpas be caught in the cycle of transmigration” (section 16). In part it appears that the distinction between “sudden” and “gradual” is a provisional one made from the unawakened standpoint that applies to Chan practitioners rather than the actual event of awakening itself. Yet can one move from delusion to enlightenment, from gradual to sudden? It also seems that the difference between “sudden” and “gradual” cannot refer to a temporal distinction, for even a “sudden awakening” certainly cannot be attained easily or without much practice; Huineng had several “sudden awakenings” but devoted himself to a lifetime of Chan practice.

Later Chan thinkers such as Zongmi (a.k.a. Guifeng, 780-841) were deeply concerned about these notions and sought to clarify them by speaking of “sudden awakening followed by gradual cultivation.” While intriguing, such a solution essentially erases any ultimate meaning to the sudden/gradual distinction. It also implies that claims to “sudden awakening” by Huineng and his followers line were rhetorical rather than genuine.

c. The Role of Text (wen) in Life

The reputation of Chan as eschewing textual study has long been a source of controversy and great appeal. We can see this even in the “Chan motto” attributed to Bodhidharma in which the dharma is said to be a “separate transmission outside the scriptures, not relying on words and letters.” There can be no arguing that Chan presents a basic distrust of scholasticism that seems to have characterized the Chinese doctrinal schools such as Tiantai and Huayan. But does this mean that texts have no place? This would hardly seem to be warranted given what we find in the Platform Sutra. In the autobiographical portions of the Sutra Huineng has his initial awakening from hearing a text (the Diamond Sutra), demonstrates his worth through his own “dharma verse,” and received official dharma transmission through verbal teachings from Hongren. Moreover, Huineng’s sermon is full of instances in which he unfolds the various meanings in a number of Buddhist texts. In addition, there are several passages in which Huineng draws attention to the text of his sermon itself, stating “If others are able to encounter the Platform Sutra, it will be as if they received the teaching personally from me” (section 47). The text goes on to note that Huineng’s closest disciples received his teaching, made copies of the Platform Sutra and entrusted them to later generations, all of whom were led through it to see into their own true natures.

An important clue for our understanding can be found when Huineng is preparing to give his “death verse.” Before launching into his final teaching he tells his disciples, “if you understand its meaning, you will be the same as I” (section 48). Like Sakyamuni before his passing, Huineng promises that that the master will remain with his students in the form of his teachings. These teachings, compiled in textual form, will have the power to lead hearers and readers to realization of their True natures once they grasp the teachings’ true import. In this reading, the Master’s role is open up the teachings via his own words (or actions) and so manifest their meaning; the crucial point is that these are transmitted by the Master and taken up by the students – a process that can only happen “outside the scriptures” themselves. There is an interesting parallel here to the view of the Neo-Confucian master Zhu Xi, who, in outlining the regimen of study for his disciples, emphasizes the importance of texts as a coming into the very presence of the Sages themselves.

The conclusion seems to be that Huineng does not denigrate texts per se, for they were instrumental in his own awakening and play a central role in his sermons. Instead, he (and later Chan tradition) attacks the tendency to treat them objectively, as material to be mastered rather than dharma gates leading to awakening. Ego, cutting off from full involvement in the world. Taking texts truly as “scripture,” however, is another matter. The words of dharma are Buddha in that they allow us to perceive truth. In this view, then, those passages in the Platform Sutra calling attention to the text itself emphasize its way of connecting one with Huineng’s wisdom offered for our awakening. What we see then is that through Huineng, Chan celebrates the centrality of text, but as “live word” internalized and acted upon rather than mere marks on the page. Such an existential engagement, however, is not typically found in the modern study of philosophy and so raises questions about what “philosophy” may actually be.

d. The Relation of Action (praxis) and Knowledge (theoria)

The centrality of practice is a major refrain in Huineng’s discourse. Despite his often-cryptic comments, the Master shares the decidedly practical focus that runs through much of Chinese philosophic culture. Time and time again, Huineng exhorts us to a life of Chan action and practice, a life of Buddhahood, rather than quietistic withdrawal. Although clearly there is some sort of “theory” informing Huineng (a sinified version of tathagatha-garbha teachings), this never takes precedence over practical application. In fact, Huineng (and Chan in general) refuses to distinguish between these two concepts, arguing essentially that true knowing is practical action. Thus, from this perspective nothing can be “true in theory” if it is not borne out in practice.

The priority of praxis is underscored by the fact that Chan is often regarded first and foremost as a “practice school.” In contrast to the doctrinal concerns of the Tiantai and Huayan, Chan emphasizes practices such as “no-thought” while maintaining that getting tangled up in mistaken ideas inevitably leads one astray. Since we are already Buddha, we must realize this through Buddha living. Only then are we awakened to the truth of our original (Buddha) nature.

There are some interesting analogies to Huineng’s perspective that provide much food for thought. Socrates, for example, famously argues that “to know the good is to do the good,” implying that true understanding is always attested in actual life. In a different vein, there is also Martin Heidegger’s existential analysis of dasein in which he focuses on our unreflective “being-in-the-world” as demonstrating a prior unthematized Understanding, that is, our actual (as opposed to theoretical) knowledge of things. Perhaps the most obvious analogy, however, can be found in the work of Wang Yangming (Wang Shouren, 1472-1529). Among his teachings, Wang maintained that knowing and acting formed an essential original unity that people often separate through their own selfish desires. In fact, Wang explained to one of his greatest disciples, “There have never been people who know but do not act. Those who are supposed to know but do not act simply do not know.”

e. The Centrality of Ritual (Li)

This matter has received little attention until recently but is an outgrowth of the general Chinese focus on practice. We have already seen that in the Platform Sutra Huineng constantly preaches to his charges to act upon his teachings, putting them into practice. This preaching, of course, is itself a type of Chan practice and, in fact, occurs within a ritual context and in a temple setting. Giving and listening to a “dharma talk” are both highly ritualized activities that follow their own specified rules. Furthermore, Huineng repeatedly enjoins his followers to chant certain vows aloud and to take various types of precepts. Thus the entire discourse is pervaded by a strong sense of ritual, or li. There is a strong, albeit implicit message here that Huineng is calling for participation in specific activities from all those in his audience, that is, all who hear or read the Platform Sutra.

Adherence to li, of course, has been a primary focus of Chinese culture from the very earliest times, and philosophical discussion of li plays a central role in Chinese thought since at least the time of Confucius. Moreover, li by their very nature are a form of highly regulated activity that require repeated engagement to learn. One learns the li by doing the li. Huineng and the text of the Platform Sutra thus underscore the highly ritualized nature of Chan life, a fact that several scholars have noted and which provides yet another strong contrast to popular (mis)understandings of Chan. Rather than being an incitement to egocentric spontaneity (which would result in utter chaos, and hence more delusion and suffering), the “sudden awakening” espoused by Huineng can only occur within a ritual context in which all parties are actively engaged. Those involved are not “doing their own thing” but participating in a shared activity in which all energies are marshaled in concert. It is just for this reason that Huineng stresses the “samadhi of oneness” and Chan monastic training involves meditation training not just during periods of actual physical sitting but throughout all daily activities.

7. Impact on Later Buddhist and Chinese Philosophical Traditions

Huineng’s impact on Chan is without parallel. Not only did he articulate the major themes that came to dominate Chan discourse and practice, he provided the model of the ideal Master. By the late eighth century, two main branches of Chan existed: the “Northern” and “Southern” schools. Claiming to have studied under Huineng, Shenhui (684-758) launched an attack on the legitimacy of “Northern” Chan, which enjoyed imperial patronage during the Tang dynasty (618-907) under the leadership of Master Shenxiu (ca. 606-706) and his heir, Puji (651-739). Alleging that his teacher was the true recipient of dharma transmission and ridiculing the latter’s “gradualist” approach to awakening, Shenhui insisted that Huineng was the real Sixth Patriarch and claimed the title of Seventh Patriarch for himself. Shenhui’s claims carried the day and by the ninth century, the “Southern” school with its teaching of “sudden awakening” was accepted as the official line. Ironically, both the “Northern” and “Southern” schools eventually died out as direct lineages. It was only later that, having survived the imperial persecutions of 841-845, other Chan schools reasserted their connection(s) to Huineng and so enshrined the tale of unilinear dharma transmission.

The Platform Sutra became wildly popular in China, perhaps because of its paradoxical “Daoist” air, and numerous copies circulated. The traditional version, printed some five hundred years after the oldest version, is almost twice the size of the original due to later additions and expansions. Huineng’s idiosyncratic way of discussing the sutras, less of a strict exegesis and more a performance of their message, a practice known as tichang (Japanese teisho) set the standard for a Chan “dharma talk.” Stories of Huineng are scattered throughout the various gong’an (Japanese koan) collections. Perhaps the most famous of these allegedly comes from Huineng’s confrontation with Huiming, the fierce former general who came to kill him on the mountaintop. As the Huiming approached, the Master asked, “Not thinking of good, not thinking of evil, just at this moment, what is our original face before your mother and father were born?” Huiming at once became enlightened. This koan is still one of the first given to beginning students in Japanese Zen monasteries.

By inaugurating a powerful new approach to the dharma, however, Huineng had impact far beyond Buddhism and Chan. Philosophically, the strongest effect was on Neo-Confucianism, a major response of Confucian tradition to the challenges offered by Buddhism, particularly Chan. Each of the “Five Great Masters” (Zhou Dunyi, Zhang Zai, Cheng Yi, Cheng Hao, Zhu Xi) studied Chan at some point in their youth, and the records of their discussions with students as well as the anecdotes concerning their lives (collected in such works as Reflections on Things at Hand) strongly resemble later Chan collections such as the Wumen guan (The Gateless Gate). Chan influence on Wang Yangming is so great as to scarcely need comment.

As for Daoism, the most obvious impact Chan had was on the formation of the Quanzhen (“Complete Perfection”) school, a monastic sect that originated in the twelfth century. The Quanzhen sect shows blatant Chan influence, from its code of regulations, meditation techniques, and even the layout of its monastic compounds. The school’s founder, Wang Chongyang (1112-1170), with his cryptic teaching style and insistence on diligent practice at all times, could even be one of Huineng’s disciples.

The portrait of Huineng emerging from Chan tradition and the Platform Sutra in particular is quite compelling. The Master is portrayed as brilliant despite (or because of) his humble beginnings and takes on a truly heroic stature through his trials and eventual triumph. In his statements, Huineng comes across as immensely charismatic. He is by turns insightful, iconoclastic and humorous. Throughout his discourse he challenges his audience to leave behind intellectual preconceptions while undercutting all attempts to grasp his meaning by rational means. Ironically, during this lengthy verbal discourse he proclaims, “the practice of self-awakening does not lie in verbal arguments.” (section 38) This despite offering long harangues against Chan practitioners who have “false views.” Huineng, thus, is the archetypal Chan Master, a model for all later Chan practitioners. We can even see traces of Huineng in the character of Yoda, the great Jedi master from the Star Wars film series. At one point in Episode V: The Empire Strikes Back, Yoda famously tells his disciple Luke Skywalker, “Do, or do not -- there is no ‘try’!” -- a line that could be straight from the Platform Sutra. Truly, Huineng lives on.

8. References and Further Reading

  • Dumoulin, Heinrich. Zen Buddhism: A History. Vol. 1, India and China. New York: Macmillan, 1988.
    • The first in a nearly exhaustive two-volume treatment of the history of Chan/Zen Buddhism (the second volume deals exclusively with Japan). Accessible, detailed, interesting, this is a fine scholarly overview that both beginners and experts will find useful.
  • Faure, Bernard. The Rhetoric of Immediacy: A Cultural Critique of Chan/Zen Buddhism. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1995.
  • Faure, Bernard. The Will to Orthodoxy: A Critical Genealogy of Northern Chan Buddhism. Stanford: Stanford University Press, 1997.
    • Along with Faure’s Ch’an Insights and Oversights (1993), these two works exemplify the detailed, technical studies of Chan/Zen that have emerged during the past two decades. Faure draws heavily on Postmodern figures (Foucault, Derrida) in his powerful, wide-ranging yet insightful critical “unmasking” of traditional understandings of Chan and Zen.
  • Hershock, Peter D. Chan Buddhism. Honolulu: University of Hawaii Press, 2005.
    • Part of the “Dimensions of Asian Spirituality” series, this may be the finest one volume overview of Chan/Zen available in English. Hershock skillfully steers a “middle way” between critical-historical scholarship and insight into the spiritual meaning of Chan/Zen teachings and practice. An admitted practicing Buddhist for over 20 years, Hershock fleshes out his “Zen Bones” with profiles of Huineng as well as other Chan masters (Bodhidharma, Mazu, and Linji). In the end he presents Chan/Zen as a vital practice that has the potential to help us shed our ego boundaries and open ourselves to our fellow human beings.
  • Hershock, Peter D. Liberating Intimacy: Enlightenment and Social Virtuosity in Ch’an Buddhism. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1996.
    • Hershock’s first book on Chan, presenting a unique and insightful philosophical take stressing Chan as a tradition of practice in the world. As the title suggests, Hershock maintains that Chan is a way towards achieving “liberating intimacy” with other sentient beings. A masterful refutation of charges that Chan/Zen is mere self-indulgent “navel gazing” or that it encourages antinomian or immoral behavior.
  • Jorgenson, John. Inventing Hui-neng, the Sixth Patriarch: Hagiography and Biography in Early Ch’an. Leiden: E. J. Brill Academic Publishing, 2005.
    • A recent critical analysis of the Huineng legend and the saga of Early Chan. The author uses the life of Confucius as the model on which Huineng’s biography is based. Very good at showing the influence of Confucianism, politics etc. on early Chan. The cover photo of Huineng’s alleged “mummy” alone is startling.
  • McRae, John R. The Northern School and the Formation of Early Ch’an Buddhism. Honolulu: University of Hawaii Press, 1986.
    • A major scholarly work drawing heavily on critical Japanese scholarship. McRae was one of the first to truly take on the traditional Chan/Zen story of the “Northern” versus “Southern” school.
  • Price, A.F., and Wong Mou-lam, trans. The Diamond Sutra and the Sutra of Hui-Neng. Boston: Shambhala Publications, Inc., 1990.
    • One of the special “Shambhala Dragon Editions” series, this work presents two of the most important texts in early Chan, and does so from a Chan perspective. While not scholarly by any means (there are very few notes), they definitely capture the iconoclastic spirit of Chan. As if to underscore this, a famous 13th century black ink painting of Huineng tearing up a sutra graces its cover. Wong’s translation of the Platform Sutra was the first ever done into English (in the 1930’s), and for that reason alone it is significant. It includes some episodes not in the Dunhuang version translated by Yampolsky (see below).
  • Suzuki, Daisetz Teitaro. The Zen Doctrine of No-mind: the Significance of the Sutra of Hui-Neng (Wei-Lang). York Beach, ME: Weiser Books, 1972.
    • Originally published in 1969, this is a posthumous work by one of the foremost (and controversial) popularizers of Zen in the West. While perhaps marked by a sort of “weisho quality,” this book demonstrates Suzuki’s awareness of critical scholarship on Chan/Zen tradition and a real understanding of many of the issues involved in Huineng’s “biography” and Zen teachings. Although not a roshi himself, Suzuki was never as much of an “outsider” to the Zen establishment as some of his critics have made him out to be. His personal experience with Zen training sharpened Suzuki’s insights and his comparisons with Christianity are thought provoking at the very least.
  • Yampolsky, Philip B., trans., The Platform Sutra of the Sixth Patriarch (New York: Columbia University Press, 1967.
    • Still the definitive English translation, based upon the Dunhuang manuscript. All quotations in the above are taken from Yampolsky’s translation. Heavily annotated, it includes a lengthy introduction (over 100 pages), glossary, and a critical edition of the Chinese text at the very end. A must read for anyone seeking to understand Chan tradition and its most famous Patriarch.

Author Information

John M. Thompson
Christopher Newport University
U. S. A.

Fazang (Fa-tsang, 643—712 C.E.)

The Buddhist ideologue Fazang (Fa-tsang) stands as one of the foremost figures of medieval Chinese Buddhism. He lived at the very pinnacle of Chinese Buddhism among towering figures such as the legendary pilgrim and Yogacara (Faxiang) master Xuanzang (602-664), the Chan patriarch Shenxiu (d. 706) and the great chronicler Daoxuan (596-667). According to Song dynasty biographer Zanning, he was “mysterious and upright, by nature surpassingly clever and sagacious.” For the better part of his life, he worked in close proximity with the highest echelons of imperial power, deeply engaged in matters of court and country. For four decades, under a series of emperors, he served as a lecturer, a translator, a rhetorician, a propagandist, and a miracleworker. Tirelessly, he lectured on the Flower Garland Sutra, translated Buddhist sutras from Sanskrit and Khotanese (a Middle Iranian language once spoken in what is now China’s Xinjiang province) into Chinese, and wrote meticulously crafted commentaries interpreting Buddhist scripture in a manner that served to exalt his imperial patron’s status. Shortly after his death, the emperor Ruizong (r. 684-690, 710-712) praised him effusively: “The late monk Fazang inherited his virtuous karma from the Heavens and his open intelligence accorded with principle. With his eloquence and outstanding understanding, he had his mind interfused with penetrating enlightenment.” He would become known as the third patriarch and systematizer of the Flower Garland (Huayan or Hua-yen) school of Buddhism.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Thought
    1. Shunyata
    2. Bodhicitta
    3. Indra's Net
    4. The Golden Lion
  3. Works
  4. References and Further Reading
    1. Secondary Sources
    2. Primary Sources

1. Biography

Fazang was a native of Sogdiana (in Chinese, Sute). This is an Iranian civilization that encompassed territories now incorporated into the modern states of Uzbekistan and Tajikistan in Central Asia. As a youth, he embraced Buddhism with fervent devotion; at sixteen, he burned off one of his fingers as an offering to the Buddha before the Aśokan reliquary in the famous Famen Temple in the Tang dynasty capital of Chang’an. Thereafter, he became a recluse on nearby Mount Taibai, where he encountered masters of the Flower Garland (Avatamsaka) Sutra. Returning to Chang’an to attend to his ailing parents, he encountered Zhiyan (602-668) and became his student and disciple. Fazang was constantly called upon to explicate the profound wonders contained in the Flower Garland Sutra, lecturing to clergy and rulers more than thirty times.

Like many eminent Buddhists, a mystical aura has grown around Fazang in subsequent hagiography. One must investigate with a careful and critical eye the many miracles and legends that surround his person. Some of the purported miracles were closely associated with his oratory prowess. In 689, when he delivered his lecture on the Flower Garland Sutra in Luoyang, a piece of auspicious ice was discovered in which, it is said, an image of “twinned pagodas” appeared. When Śiksānanda and he were translating the Flower Garland Sutra in Luoyang, a hundred-petaled lotus flower blossomed in front of the translation hall. After lectures in 692 and 696, light allegedly issued from Fazang’s mouth, prompting the congregated faithful to marvel. On other occasions, following his lectures, it is said that flowers fell from the heavens and five-colored clouds accumulated in the skies.

Fazang appears to have been a practitioner of esoteric Buddhism, which many East Asian rulers believed commanded magical powers. In 697, the throne requested that he use Buddhist scriptural magic to help defeat the Khitan, a proto-Mongolian ethnic group that once dominated what is now Manchuria. Fazang performed a ritual cleansing, changed clothes, set an eleven-faced image of the bodhisattva (an enlightened being who selflessly seeks to aid others) Guanyin (Kuan-yin) on a ritual platform, and worked his magic. Heavenly drums echoed, the image of Guanyin appeared on high, surveying the countless divine troops who materialized to combat the raiders, inspiring the Zhou forces and plunging the Khitan into despair. This triumph prompted the empress Wu Zhao to exclaim, “This is the blessed aegis of Buddha force!” and change the reign era name to Shengong (“Divine Merit”).

He was also renowned as a conjurer, capable of summoning weather. On multiple occasions, his prayers and rites brought timely rain to alleviate drought. In 687, at the empress’ behest, he prayed for rain, fasting for seven days, until the skies fortuitously opened and drenched the parched ground. Again, in 696, his prayers proved effective in bringing salubrious rain to afflicted Yongzhou. In 702, Fazang invited another monk to pray at Wuzhen Temple in Lantian, which had no spring. After three dawns of reciting sutras, a freshet suddenly jetted forth at Maitreya Pavilion, bringing vernal bounty to the surrounding lands. Under the emperor Zhongzong, when drought struck Chang’an, Fazang prayed and performed Buddhist rites for seven days, finally bringing a downpour. The following year his prayers for rain were successful once again. Under the emperor Ruizong, he relieved drought and snowless winter, his sincere prayers brought down a blizzard.

In spite of his impressive monastic, scholastic, and thaumaturgical credentials, Fazang was no detached ascetic who speculated on matters recondite and metaphysical. Under Wu Zhao (a.k.a. Empress Wu or Wu Zetian, 624-705, r. 690-705), the only female emperor in Chinese history, the Buddhist clergy was politicized as never before. Contending against a Confucian tradition that stridently opposed her assumption of power, Wu Zhao naturally sought validation for her sovereignty in Buddhism. She styled herself in Buddhist terms as a cakravartin (a universal wheel-turning monarch) and a living bodhisattva. A brilliant orator, lecturer, ideologue, rhetorician and translator, Fazang was one of many Buddhist ideologues who helped sanction her sovereignty. He differed from the vast majority of her other Buddhist supporters in that he was an independent-minded and profound thinker who lectured to Wu Zhao, rather than mustering rhetoric for her. The remarkable duration and depth of their mutual commitment also stands out. For better than three decades, beginning when he preached the Flower Garland Sutra on behalf of her recently deceased mother, he applied his abundant talents toward enhancing Wu Zhao’s reputation as a Buddhist ruler.

At a pivotal juncture of Wu Zhao’s political ascent, as part of a grand ceremony early in 689 that anticipated the inauguration of her Zhou dynasty by a single year, she ordered Fazang to convene a dharma assembly and, from an elevated seat, expound upon the Flower Garland Sutra to thousands of Buddhist monks and nuns congregated for the event. When Fazang delivered a lecture at Buddha’s Prophecy Temple in Luoyang in 700 (shortly after the completion of his new translation of the Flower Garland Sutra), the ground of the lecture hall and temple purportedly shook. Rather than interpreting this earthquake in Confucian fashion, as an inauspicious disharmony of the elements, Wu Zhao understood it as a wondrous event, praising Fazang:

Because he has extended the knowledge of the subtle and profound; disseminated wisdom on the mysterious and abstruse, on the first day of translation, I dreamed that sweet dew descended as an auspicious sign. On the morning of the lecture I felt the earth tremor, a miraculous sign. This, then, was the footfall of the Future Buddha, Maitreya, using the mandala as a lucky icon.

This marriage of ideology and power did not end happily. In Wu Zhao’s turn toward Daoist expiatory rites and longevity potions during her final years, Fazang felt a shift in his patron’s imperial favor. In early 705, Fazang transported the sacred finger-bone of the Buddha from Famen Temple to Luoyang, where Wu Zhao placed him in charge of the relic veneration ceremony, which she believed might ameliorate her declining health. In this official capacity, which provided him access to her person and to the Forbidden City, Fazang worked in tandem with conspirators from the court and betrayed his longstanding patron Wu Zhao, supporting the coup that removed her in 705. A political opportunist, he continued to promote Flower Garland Buddhism serving under emperors Zhongzong (r. 684, 705-710), Ruizong, and Xuanzong (r. 712-756). Curiously, his treachery, to no small extent, saved Buddhism from being identified as a rogue ideology used to validate one whom the Confucian establishment styled an illegitimate female usurper.

Fazang’s successful promotion and propagation of Flower Garland Buddhism under successive rulers played an important role in the subsequent spread, development and Sinification of the school. Over a period of three decades, Fazang played a leading role in these cooperative efforts among the corps of Indian, Khotanese, Sogdian, Korean and Chinese writing translations and commentaries on Buddhist sutras. In Fazang’s epistolary correspondence with Korean Flower Garland monk Ŭisang, another disciple of his master Zhiyan, it is apparent that he attempted to propagate a worldwide state without barriers, an infinite realm linked by the Mahayana Buddhist faith. Fazang also taught another Korean monk, Shimsang, who helped transmit Chinese Flower Garland Buddhism to Japan. Ultimately, these contacts helped propagate Flower Garland Buddhism, linking it to a wider pan-Asian network

2. Thought

a. Shunyata

At the very heart of Flower Garland Buddhism is the idea of what is known in Sanskrit as shunyata (“emptiness”): universal interconnectedness, all-inclusiveness, intercausality and interpenetration. Fazang did a great deal to elevate Flower Garland Buddhism over rival schools, acknowledging other Buddhist schools and sutras, but championing the Flower Garland Sutra as the central teaching of the Buddha. As the Buddha’s first sermon upon attaining enlightenment, the nearly incomprehensible Flower Garland Sutra was invested with a profundity and wisdom unequalled in the Buddha’s subsequent works. In this effort, Fazang gathered and classified the rather unsystematic and wide-ranging Buddhist teachings into five categories in order of ascending profundity and power. In ascending order: Hinayana, Initial Mahayana, Final Mahayana, Sudden Teaching of the One Vehicle (proto-Zen), and, at the pinnacle, the Comprehensive Teaching of the One Vehicle—in essence, the Flower Garland Sutra. The sense of universality allowed the Flower Garland School to be compatible with other sects, effectively encompassing their doctrine, while maintaining the overarching primacy of the Flower Garland teachings.

b. Bodhicitta

This doctrine of interdependence is also reflected in Fazang’s thoughts on bodhicitta (mental dedication to helping all sentient beings and attaining enlightenment). Following the logic that each element pervades all that exists and itself contains all other elements in the phenomenal world, “In practicing the virtues, when one is perfected, all are perfected,” he writes, “and when one first arouses the thought of enlightenment one also becomes perfectly enlightened” (trans. Wright). Fazang’s emphasis on the omniversal generative power of the tathagatagarbha, the “womb of Buddhahood,” while not unique, subsequently developed into an important concept in the East Asian Mahayana Buddhist tradition.

So that others might better comprehend the profound doctrine of the Flower Garland Sutra, Fazang used the metaphor of the Ten Mysteries (Ten Mysterious Gates) to explicate the interconnectedness and inter-causality in the Flower Garland universe. These Ten Mysteries illustrate how seemingly contradictory pairs—the hidden and the manifest, truth and falsehood, the infinite and the infinitesimal, the general and the specific--mutually complement each other and coexist without obstruction. Indra’s net (see below) is one of the Ten Mysteries.

Fazang’s ideas of an interconnected omniverse extended easily and effectively from the metaphysical realm to the political arena. Indeed, it allowed Wu Zhao to serve as the alpha link in a cosmic concatenation. Stanley Weinstein has commented “Seeing herself as a universal monarch, she must have been attracted by the Flower Garland school with its well-ordered universe presided over by Vairocana Buddha, whose every act was reflected in countless worlds.” This integrated and totalistic vision of the cosmos was “analogous to the highly centralized imperial state that she ruled.” This ideology allowed Wu Zhao to portray herself as an absolute sovereign, all-pervasive and omnipresent. This central idea of the boundless reach of the Buddha’s power and compassion, nicely paralleled and supported the idea of the infinite compass of the ruler’s authority and benevolence. Fazang’s creative presentation and flair for theater (see below), both enhanced the great aesthetic, intellectual and philosophical appeal of his ideas and made them more comprehensible. In Wu Zhao, he found a potential cakravartin to propagate the Buddhist faith; in Fazang’s profound thought, she, in turn, discovered powerful ideological justification for her authority.

c. Indra's Net

When Fazang first lectured on the Flower Garland Sutra, the principles he expounded upon were so abstruse that the listeners were utterly dumbstruck. Therefore, to render the sutra comprehensible to his imperial patrons and to the masses of Buddhist faithful, he used metaphors such as Indra’s Net of Jewels and the Golden Lion. In the former, “In each of the jewels, the images of all the other jewels are reflected...the images multiply infinitely, and all these multiple images are bright and clear within a single jewel.” This concatenation, this mutual linking and inter-penetration, illustrates harmonious interconnectedness of everything. Here, causal sky net objects can not be conceived of independently: the nature of each object is defined by its place with relation to all other objects. He also devised a Hall of Mirrors to illustrate the workings of Indra’s Net and the power of the Buddha by arranging ten mirrors (corresponding with the Ten Mysterious Gates), eight in an octagon, one above and one below, with a statue of the Buddha set in the middle, the focal point of origin and return. When he lit a torch to illumine the centerpiece, an endless web of reflected light crisscrossed, creating an infinite series of images within images, each containing the entire Buddha. This demonstration made manifest the meaning of the inexhaustible interconnectedness of the universe, hence the infinite power of the Buddha.

d. The Golden Lion

Fazang’s most famous device of performative metaphor was a lion made of gold. The lion represents the cosmos, parts of the lion the various phenomena of the universe, while the gold represented emptiness. The lion had a mane, teeth, claws and eyes: parts that seemed distinct and unrelated. And yet the essential substance of the entire lion was the same--gold. Within each hair, paradoxically, there are infinite lions. The differences are all superficial. Such is the nature of the integrated, interconnected Flower Garland universe. After demonstrating this principle to Wu Zhao using the sculpture of a lion at the imperial palace gate around 700 (sources differ), Fazang wrote a one-chapter Essay on the Golden Lion.

In his Treatise on the Five Teachings, a house is used as a metaphor for the universe. The complex interplay between joists, uprights, roof, tenons and mortises—the sum total of structural relationships between all parts--is contained in a single rafter. The nature of the infinite can be seen in the infinitesimal. The role of the rafter--or any other component--helps one understand the interdependence of all sentient beings. Certainly, Fazang’s flair for the theatrical and his ability to convey the message to his patrons through such brilliant demonstrations, helped successfully propagate Flower Garland Buddhism.

3. Works

Much of Fazang’s energy was devoted to exegetical work on and demonstrations of the Flower Garland Sutra. He produced more than sixty original works, commentaries on a wide variety of Buddhist texts, and meditation manuals, and participated in many Buddhist translation projects. Collectively, Fazang’s works and translations must be looked at not only in terms of their metaphysical and ideological merit, but as political rhetoric consciously geared toward promoting the Flower Garland school and exalting the sovereignty of his imperial sponsors. Fazang’s Treatise on the Five Teachings detailed a hierarchy of Buddhist sects, placing, of course, Flower Garland at the apex and clarifying common ideological ground.

Fazang was a propagandist. His Huayanjing zhuanji, a commentary he wrote between 690 and 693, helped provide legitimacy for Wu Zhao’s claim to be a cakravartin. Making reference to her titles as “Sage Mother” and “Divine Sovereign,” Fazang remarked, “Both sage and divine, she makes the Six Supernatural Penetrations act without stopping; infinitely good and infinitely beautiful, she displays the Ten Goodnesses beyond all limits.”

For Wu Zhao, retranslating and reinterpreting the Flower Garland Sutra was an ongoing, high-priority political activity. Fazang played a pivotal role in this effort. The Flower Garland Sutra was at the heart of a deep-rooted and longstanding Khotanese tradition of Buddhist kingship, with a Chinese lineage going from ruler Shi Hu of the Eastern Jin in the 4th century to Liang Wudi to Sui Wendi and finally to Wu Zhao. She sent emissaries to Khotan to seek the Sanskrit version of the Flower Garland Sutra. In 679, the Indian monk Divākara presented newly recovered Sanskrit sutras at Gaozong’s court. In 684, with Divākara, Fazang worked on a translation of the Flower Garland Sutra at Western Taiyuan Temple. As preparatory work for the compilation of the new Flower Garland Sutra, Fazang compared these new texts to extant translations, noting disparities and incorporating omissions. Between 695 and 699, she recruited Khotanese monks such as Śiksānanda and Devaprajña to work in tandem with Fazang, completing a new, improved Flower Garland Sutra that was eighty chapters instead of sixty. This new Flower Garland Sutra superseded the version completed in the 680s and helped confirm Wu Zhao’s identification as a cakravartin and a bodhisattva.

4. References and Further Reading

a. Secondary Sources

  • Chan, Wing-tsit, ed. A Source Book in Chinese Philosophy. Princeton University Press, 1963.
  • Pages 406–424 include a brief survey of Flower Garland school thought and a full translation of the “Golden Lion Essay.”
  • Chen, Jinhua. Monks and Monarchs, Kinship and Kingship: Tanqian in Sui Buddhism and Politics. Italian School of East Asian Studies Essays Series, vol. 3. Kyoto: Scuola Italiana di Studi sull’Asia Orientale, 2002.
  • Chen, Jinhua. “More Than a Philosopher: Fazang (643-712) as a Politician and Miracle-worker.” History of Religions 42.4 (May 2003): 320-358.
  • Cook, Francis. Hua-yen Buddhism: The Jewel Net of Indra. Penn State University Press, 1977.
  • DeBary, Wm. Th., et al, eds. Sources of Chinese Tradition, Vol I., 2nd ed. Columbia University Press, 1999.
  • Pp. 471-476 includes sections from the Flower Garland Sutra such as “The Tower of Vairocana” and “Indra’s Net.”
  • Fang, Litian. Huayan jin shizi zhang jiaoshi, Zhongguo Fojiao dianji xuankan. Zhonghua, 1996.
  • Forte, Antonino. A Jewel in Indra’s Net: The Letter Sent by Fazang in China to Ŭisang in Korea. Italian School of East Asian Studies Occasional Papers 8. Kyoto, 2000.
  • Forte, Antonino. Mingtang and Buddhist Utopias in the History of the Astronomical Clock: The Tower, the Statue and the Armillary Sphere Constructed by Empress Wu. Rome, 1988. See pp. 121-122.
  • Forte, Antonino. Political Propaganda and Ideology in China at the End of the Seventh Century. Naples, 1977.
  • Fox, Alan. “Fazang.” Great Thinkers of the Eastern World, ed. Ian P. McGreal (HarperCollins, 1995), 99-103.
  • Gu, Zhengmei. “Wu Zetian de Huayan jing: Fowang chuantong yu fowang xingxiang.” Guoxue yanjiu 7 (2000): 279-321.
  • Liu, Ming-Wood. “The Harmonious Universe of Fa-tsang and Leibniz.” Philosophy East and West 32 (1982): 61-76.
  • Rothschild, Norman H. Sub-chapter “Fazang” in “Rhetoric, Ritual and Support Constituencies in the Political Authority of Wu Zhao, Woman Emperor of China.” Ph.D. dissertation, Brown University, 2003.
  • Weinstein, Stanley. “Imperial Patronage in T’ang Buddhism.” Perspectives on the T’ang, eds. Arthur F. Wright and Denis C. Pritchett (Yale University Press, 1973), 265-306.
  • Weinstein, Stanley. Buddhism in T’ang China. Cambridge University Press, 1987.
  • Wright, Dale. “The ‘Thought of Enlightenment’ In Fa-tsang’s Hua-yen Buddhism.” The Eastern Buddhist (Fall 2001): 97-106.

b. Primary Sources

  • Ch’oe Ch’iwŏn (Cui Zhiyuan), Da Tang Jianfusi gu shu fanjing dade Fazang heshang zhuan, (Taisho Tripitika, vol. 50, no. 2054).
    • Biography.
  • Daoxuan, Xu Gaoseng zhuan (Biographies of Eminent Monks), Taisho Triptika, vol. 50, no. 2060.
    • Biography.
  • Fazang, Dasheng qixinlun yiji, Taisho Tripitika vol. 44, no. 1846.
  • Fazang, Fanwang jing pusa jieben shu, Taisho Tripitika vol. 40, no. 1813.
    • Commentary on Brahmajala sutra.
  • Fazang, Huayanjing tanxuan ji (Taisho Tripitika, vol. 35, no. 1733).
    • Commentary on the profundities of the Flower Garland Sutra.
  • Fazang, Huayan jing wenyi gangmu, Taisho Tripitika, vol 35, no. 1734.
    • Explicates the ten mysterious gates (Ten Mysteries) from the Flower Garland Sutra.
  • Fazang, Huayanjing zhigui (Taisho Tripitika, vol. 45, no. 1871).
    • Commentary on the Flower Garland Sutra.
  • Fazang, Huayanjing zhuanji (Taisho Tripitika, vol. 51, no. 2073).
    • Propaganda supporting Wu Zhao’s sovereignty written between 690 and 693.
  • Fazang, Huayan Wujiao zhang (Treatise of the Five Teachings), Taisho Tripitika, vol. 45, no, 1866.
    • Central work that classifies Buddhist teachings and situates the Flower Garland Sutra at the apex.
  • Fazang, Jin shizi zhang, (Essay on the Golden Lion), Taisho Tripitika vol. 45, no. 1881.
  • Yan Chaoyin, “Da Tang Jianfusi gu dade Kangzang fashi zhi bei,” Taisho Tripitika, vol. 50, no. 2054.
    • Funerary epitaph.
  • Zanning, Song Gaoseng zhuan, Taisho Tripitika, vol. 50, no. 2061.
  • Zhipan, Fozu tongji, Taisho Tripitika vol. 49, no. 2035.
    • Biography is fascicle 29 of this Southern Song dynasty (1127-1279) work.

Author Information

Norman Harry Rothschild
University of North Florida
U. S. A.

Thomas Aquinas: Moral Philosophy

aquinasThe moral philosophy of St. Thomas Aquinas (1225-1274) involves a merger of at least two apparently disparate traditions: Aristotelian eudaimonism and Christian theology. On the one hand, Aquinas follows Aristotle in thinking that an act is good or bad depending on whether it contributes to or deters us from our proper human end—the telos or final goal at which all human actions aim. That telos is eudaimonia, or happiness, where “happiness” is understood in terms of completion, perfection, or well-being. Achieving happiness, however, requires a range of intellectual and moral virtues that enable us to understand the nature of happiness and motivate us to seek it in a reliable and consistent way.

On the other hand, Aquinas believes that we can never achieve complete or final happiness in this life. For him, final happiness consists in beatitude, or supernatural union with God. Such an end lies far beyond what we through our natural human capacities can attain. For this reason, we not only need the virtues, we also need God to transform our nature—to perfect or “deify” it—so that we might be suited to participate in divine beatitude. Moreover, Aquinas believes that we inherited a propensity to sin from our first parent, Adam. While our nature is not wholly corrupted by sin, it is nevertheless diminished by sin’s stain, as evidenced by the fact that our wills are at enmity with God’s. Thus we need God’s help in order to restore the good of our nature and bring us into conformity with his will. To this end, God imbues us with his grace which comes in the form of divinely instantiated virtues and gifts.

This article first considers Aquinas’s metaethical views. Those views provide a good context for understanding his unique synthesis of Christian teaching and Aristotelian philosophy. Also, his meta-ethical views provide an ideal background for understanding other features of his moral philosophy such as the nature of human action, virtue, natural law, and the ultimate end of human beings. While contemporary moral philosophers tend to address these subjects as discrete topics of study, Aquinas’s treatment of them yields a bracing, comprehensive view of the moral life. This article presents these subjects in a way that illuminates their interconnected roles.

Table of Contents

  1. Metaethics
  2. The Nature of Human Action
  3. The Cardinal Virtues
    1. Prudence
    2. Temperance
    3. Courage
    4. Justice
  4. Natural Law
  5. Charity and Beatitude
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Metaethics

Aquinas’s metaethical views are indebted to the writings of several Christian thinkers, particularly Augustine’s Confessions, Boethius’s De hebdomadibus, and perhaps Anselm’s Monologium. Due to the constraints of space, the present section will only consider Augustine’s influence on Aquinas’s views.

According to Augustine, “things that exist are good” (Confessions VII.12). This claim is meant to express a basic metaphysical idea, namely, that if something exists, then it necessarily has some degree of goodness. Augustine’s argument for this claim is as follows. We can divide existing things into two categories: incorruptible things and corruptible things, with the latter being inferior to the former. If something is incorruptible, then by definition it cannot be made worse; that is, it cannot lose whatever goodness it may have. On the other hand, if something is corruptible, then it can be made worse. Notice that a thing’s being corruptible presupposes having goodness. Otherwise, it would not have any goodness it could lose. While this argument may be sufficient to show that corruptible things necessarily have goodness, Augustine uses it to identify a problem with the view that something can exist even if it has no goodness at all. For if something has no goodness, then it cannot lose goodness and must therefore be incorruptible. And since incorruptibility is better than corruptibility, it looks as if something lacking goodness is better than its corruptible counterpart, which has goodness. Clearly, this is incoherent. Augustine writes: “What can be more monstrous than to maintain that by losing all [its] goodness [something can] become better” (Ibid.)? Yet this is precisely the implication of claiming that something with no goodness whatsoever can exist. According to Augustine, the only remedy for this problem is to deny the existence of things that have no goodness. If something exists, then it must necessarily have goodness.

Echoing the general thrust of Augustine’s argument, Aquinas claims that “Goodness and being are really the same.” (Summa Theologiae [hereafter ST] Ia 5.1). The term “being” here is roughly equivalent to what is actual or existing. Thus what Aquinas means to convey is that something is good insofar as it actual. By contrast, evil has no actuality in its own right. It would be a mistake, then, to speak of evil as an actual “thing,” if by “thing” we mean an existing being or quality. For evil is a deprivation of what is actual, like blindness or sickness. For this reason, Aquinas says that something is evil “inasmuch as it is deprived of some particular good that pertains to its due or proper perfection” (QDM 1.1 ad 1; ST Ia 48.2 passim). Again, Augustine’s influence is clear. For him, something is evil insofar as its existence is diminished or corrupted in some way. If something had no goodness whatsoever, it would lack all goods, even the good of existence itself. Augustine says, “if something where deprived of all goodness, it would be altogether nothing; therefore as long as something is, it is good” (Confessions,VII.12).

Aquinas’s meta-ethics is also indebted to an Aristotelian view of living things. Following Aristotle, Aquinas says that living things are composites of matter and substantial form. By “substantial form” he means a principle that organizes matter into a discrete substance equipped with certain powers or “potentialities.” On this view, a thing’s substantial form constitutes the nature a thing has; it is the metaphysical aspect in virtue of which a substance is the kind of thing it is and has the species-defining powers it has (ST Ia 76.1; Cf. Ia 5.5; IaIIae 85.4). Aquinas goes on to argue that all substances seek their own perfection (ST Ia 6.1). That is, they all seek as their final end a fully realized state of existence or actuality. Yet a substance cannot achieve that final end without exercising the powers it has in virtue of its substantial form. As Scott MacDonald explains: “The end, completion, or perfection of a natural substance is its having fully actualized its specifying capacity [or power], its actually performing the activity for which its form or nature provides the capacity” (MacDonald, 1991a: 5). In other words, a substance achieves its perfection through the proper exercise of its species-defining powers. And because Aquinas thinks that existence and goodness have the same referent, it appears that the proper exercise of those powers also contributes to that substance’s goodness. For “since the state or activity that constitutes a substance’s full actuality is that substance’s end and an end is good, that state or activity constitutes the substance’s good.” (Ibid.).

Aquinas considers a fairly straightforward objection to this view: “Goodness can be more or less. But being cannot be more or less. Therefore goodness differs from being” (ST Ia 5.1 obj. 3). In other words, goodness is a relative property. Some people are morally better than other people. Some horses are more developed and better trained than other horses. Some organs are healthier and function better than organs. In each case, the goodness things have will not be identical in terms of quantity. On the other hand, being (understood in terms of being actual or existing) is not varied in this way. Something either exists or it doesn’t. This crucial difference seems to prove that being and goodness cannot be the same. In addressing this worry, Aquinas concedes that there is a kind of existence, or being, that is all-or-nothing. He calls this “substantial being,” or being simply. Something has substantial being as long as it is actual or exists (ST Ia 5.1 ad 1). We might also claim that every thing that has substantial being also has substantialgoodness. That is, something is good insofar it exists or has being.

On the other hand, members of the same species can enjoy different grades of maturity or completeness. As Norman Kretzmann and Eleonore Stump explain, something may be “a more or less fully developed actualized specimen” (Kretzmann and Stump, 1988: 292). For example, a healthy adult dog is more developed—that is, more actualized—than a puppy, whose fledgling state prevents it from participating in those activities characteristic of more mature dogs (e.g., reproduction, nurturing their young, etc.). The actuality referred to here is what Aquinas calls relative being. He says: “by its substantial being, everything is said to have being simply; but by any further actuality it is said to have being relatively” (STIa 5.1 ad 1). The idea of “relative being” refers to the quality that accrues when a living thing exercises its species-defining capacities and, in turn, becomes a more perfect. Again, by “more perfect” Aquinas simply means “more actual.” For “anything whatever is perfect to the extent that it is in actuality, since potentiality without actuality is imperfect” (ST IaIIae 3.2). And just as a thing’s relative being is a matter of degree, so there is a kind of goodness—“relative goodness”—that corresponds to the degree of actuality a thing has. For “goodness [in the current sense] is spoken of as more or less according to a thing's superadded actuality”—the kind of actuality that goes beyond a thing’s mere substantial being (STIa 5.1 ad 3; ST IaIIae 18.1; SCG III 3, 4).

The forgoing analysis provides the conceptual background for understanding the nature of human goodness. As we have seen, something is good to the extent that its species-defining powers are properly actualized. For Aquinas, the species-defining characteristic of human beings is reason. And since something achieves goodness by exercising its species-defining powers, it follows that reason’s proper exercise will result in human goodness. Kretzmann and Stump put the point this way: “human goodness, like any goodness appropriate to one’s species, is acquired by performing instances of the operations specific to its species, which in the case of humanity is the rational employment of rational powers” (Kretzmann and Stump, 1988: 287). In short, human goodness ultimately consists in the proper exercise of a person’s rational capacities. This analysis of human goodness serves to guide our evaluation of human actions. Whether an action is good (or bad) depends on whether it is commensurate with (or contrary to) our nature as rational beings. In this way, the real difference between good and bad actions is a difference in relation to reason (ST IaIIae 18.5).

2. The Nature of Human Action

According to Aquinas’s metaethics, human goodness depends on performing acts that are in accord with our human nature. But what but sort of acts are those? In other words, what feature or features serve to distinguish human acts from acts of a different kind? Here we must go beyond the simple claim that an action is human just insofar as it is rational. For while this claim is no doubt true, the nature of rationality itself needs explanation. This section seeks to explore more fully just what rationality or reason consists in according to Aquinas. Only then can we understand the nature of human action and the end at which such action aims.

Aquinas provides the most comprehensive treatment of this subject in the second part of the Summa theologiae. There, he explains that reason is comprised of two powers: one cognitive, the other appetitive. The cognitive power is the intellect, which enables us to know and understand. The intellect also enables us to apprehend the goodness a thing has. The appetitive power of reason is called the will. Aquinas describes the will as a native desire for the understood good. That is, it is an appetite that is responsive to the intellect’s estimations of what is good or choiceworthy (ST Ia 82.1; QDV 3.22.12). On this view, all acts of will are dependent on antecedent acts of intellect; the intellect must supply the will with the object to which the latter inclines. In turn, that object moves the will as a final cause “because the good understood is the object of the will, and moves it as an end” (ST Ia 82.4).

From the abbreviated account of intellect and will provided thus far, it may appear that the intellect necessitates the will’s acts by its own evaluative portrayals of goodness. Yet Aquinas insists that no single account of the good can necessitate the will’s movement. Most goods do not have a necessary connection to happiness. That is, we do not need them in order to be happy; thus the will does not incline to them of necessity (ST Ia 82.2). But what of those goods that do have a necessary connection to happiness? What about the goodness of God or those virtues that lead us to God “in whom alone true happiness consists” (Ibid.)? According to Aquinas, the will does not incline necessarily to these goods, either. For in this life we cannot see God in all his goodness, and thus the connection between God, virtue, final happiness will always appear opaque. Aquinas writes: “until through the certitude of the Divine Vision the necessity of such connection be shown, the will does not adhere to God of necessity, nor to those things which are of God” (Ibid.).

In this life, then, our intellectual limitations prevent us from apprehending what is good simpliciter. Instead, we are presented with competing goods between which we must choose (ST Ia 82.2 ad 1). Some goods provide immediate gratification but no long-term fulfillment. Other goods may precipitate hardship but eventually make us better people. Indeed, sometimes we must exercise considerable effort in ignoring superficial or petty pleasures while attending to more difficult yet enduring goods. To employ Aquinas’s parlance, the will must exercise efficient causality on the intellect by instructing it to consider some goods rather than others (ST Ia 82.4). This happens whenever we, through our own determination, direct our attention away from certain desirable objects and toward those we think are more choiceworthy. Of course, our character will often govern the goods we desire and ultimately choose. Even so, Aquinas does not think that our character wholly determines our choices, as evidenced by the fact that we sometimes make decisions that are contrary to our established habits. This is actually fortunate for us, for it suggests that even people disposed toward evil can manage to make good choices and perhaps begin to correct their more hardened and inordinate inclinations.

Now we are prepared to answer the question posed at the beginning of this section: what actions are those we can designate as human? The answer is this: human actions are those over which one has voluntary control (ST IaIIae 1.1). Unlike non-rational animals, human beings choose their actions according to a reasoned account of what they think is good. Seen this way, human actions are not products of deterministic causal forces. They are products of our own free judgment (liberum arbitrium), the exercise of which is a function of both intellect and will (ST Ia 83.3). When discussing what it is that makes an action "human," then, Aquinas has in mind those capacities whereby one judges and chooses what is good. For it is through one's ability to deliberate and judge in this way that one exercises mastery over one's actions (ST IaIIae 1.1).

So far, we’ve established that human actions are actions that are governed by a reasoned consideration of what is good. Aquinas also thinks that the good in question functions as an end—the object for the sake of which the agent acts. “For the object of the will is the end and the good” (Ibid.). There are two worries that emerge here, both of which can be resolved rather quickly. First, it seems we do not always act for the sake of an end. Many actions we perform are not products of our own deliberation and voluntary judgment (like nervous twitches, coughs, or unconscious tapping of the foot). Yet Aquinas points out that acts of this sort are not properly human acts “since they do not proceed from the deliberation of the reason” (Ibid., ad 3). In order for an act to count as a human act, it must be a product of the agent’s reasoned consideration about what is good. Second, it appears that Aquinas is mistaken when he says that the ends for the sake of which we act are good. Clearly, many things we pursue in life are not good. Aquinas does not deny this. He agrees that cognitive errors and excessive passion can distort our moral views and, in turn, incline us to choose the wrong things. Aquinas's point, however, is that our actions are done for the sake of what we believe (rightly or wrongly) to be good. Whether the ends we pursue are in fact good is a separate question—one to which we will return below.

Aquinas does not simply wish to defend the claim that human acts are for the sake of some good. Following Augustine, he insists that our actions are for the sake of a final good—a last end which we desire for its own sake and for the sake of which everything else is chosen (ST Ia 1.6 sed contra ). If there was no such end, we would have a hard time explaining why anyone chooses to do anything at all. The reason for this is as follows. Aquinas argues that for every action or series of actions there must be something that is first in “order of intention” (ST Ia 1.4). In other words, there must be some end or good that is intrinsically desirable and serves the will’s final cause. According to this view, such a good is a catalyst for desire and is therefore necessary in order for us to act for the sake of what we desire. MacDonald writes, “one can explain [a given action] only by appealing to some end or good that is itself capable of moving the will—that is, by appealing to an end that is viewed desirable in itself” (MacDonald, 1991b: 44). Were you to remove the intrinsically desirable end, then you would remove the very principle that motivates us to act in the first place (ST IaIIae 1.4). This account also helps explain why we cannot postulate an “indefinite series of ends” when explaining human actions (Ibid.). For the existence of an indefinite series of ends would mean that there is no intrinsically desirable good for the sake of which we act. In the absence of any such good, we would not desire anything and thus never have the necessary motivation to act (Ibid.). So there must be a last end or final good that we desire for its own sake.

This last claim still does not capture what Aquinas ultimately wishes to show, namely, that there is a singleend for the sake of which all of us act (ST IaIIae 1.5). To put the matter as starkly as possible, Aquinas wants to argue that every human act of every human being is for the sake of a single end that is the same for everyone (ST IaIIae 1.5-7). The previous argument did not require us to think that the final end for which we act is the same for everyone. Nor did it show that the end at which every human being aims consists in a specific, solitary good (as opposed to a constellation of goods). What, exactly, is this last end at which we aim? As we saw in the preceding section, all of us seek after our own perfection (ST Ia 1.6). We do so by performing actions we think will—directly or indirectly—contribute to or facilitate a life that is more complete or fulfilling than it would be otherwise. In other words, the last end—the end or good that we desire for its own sake—is happiness, whereby “happiness” Aquinas means the sort of perfection or fulfillment just described.

Admittedly, this claim is fairly abstract and uncontroversial. After all, Aquinas does not say whathappiness consists in--the thing in which it is realized. He simply wishes to show that there is something everyone desires and pursues, namely, ultimate fulfillment. He says, “everyone desires the fulfillment of their perfection, and it is precisely this fulfillment in which the last end consists” (ST IaIIae 1.7; emphasis mine). So construed, the idea of the last end is, as MacDonald explains, a “formal concept…of the complete and perfect good, that which completely satisfies desire” (MacDonald, 1991b: 61). But while everyone acts for the sake of such an end abstractly conceived, Aquinas recognizes that there is considerable disagreement over what it is in which happiness consists (ST IaIIae 1.7). So there is a difference between the idea of the last end (an idea for the sake of which everyone acts) and the specific object in which the last end is thought to consist (Ibid.). Some people think that the last end consists in the acquisition of external goods, like riches, power, or fame (ST IaIIae 2.1-4). Others think it consists in goods of the body, like comeliness or physical pleasure (ST IaIIae 2.5 and 6). And still others think that happiness consists in acquiring goods of the soul such as knowledge, virtue, and friendship (ST IaIIae 2.7). But as laudable as some of these good are (particularly those of the latter category), they are all beset with unique deficiencies that preclude them from providing the kind of complete fulfillment characteristic of final happiness.

What is it, then, in which our last end really consists or is realized? For Aquinas, the last end of happiness can only consist in that which is perfectly good, which is God. Because God is perfect goodness, he is the only one capable of fulfilling our heart’s deepest longing and facilitating the perfection at which we aim. Thus he says that human beings “attain their last end by knowing and loving God” (ST IaIIae 1.8). Aquinas refers to this last end—the state in which perfect happiness consists—as the beatific vision. The beatific vision is a supernatural union with God, the enjoyment of which surpasses the satisfaction afforded by those goods people sometimes associate with the last end. But if perfect happiness consists in the beatific vision, then why do people fail to seek it? Actually, all people do seek it—at least in some sense. As we have already noted, all of us desire our own perfection, which is synonymous with final happiness. Unfortunately, many of our actions are informed by mistaken views of what happiness really consists in. These views may be the result of some intellectual or cognitive error (say if one’s views are the result of ignorance or ill-informed deliberation). But more than likely, our mistaken views will be the result of certain appetitive excesses that corrupt our understanding of what is really good. For this reason, good actions require excellences—or virtues—of both mind and appetite. The next section seeks to explain more fully what those virtues are and why we need them.

3. The Cardinal Virtues

Aquinas offers several definitions of virtue. According to one very general account, a virtue is a habit that “disposes an agent to perform its proper operation or movement” (DVC 1; ST IaIIae 49.1). Because we know that reason is the proper operation of human beings, it follows that a virtue is a habit that disposes us to reason well. This account is too broad for our present purposes. While all virtues contribute in some way to our rational perfection, not every virtue disposes us to live morally good lives. Some virtues are strictly intellectual perfections, such as the ability to grasp universals or the causes underlying the world’s origin and operation. For the purposes of this essay, our concern will be with those virtues that are related to moral decision and action. That is, we will consider those virtues which Aquinas (following Augustine) describes as “good [qualities] of mind whereby we live righteously” (ST IaIIae 55.4).

A cursory glance at the second part of the Summa Theologiae would reveal a host of virtues that are indicative of human goodness. But there are essentially four virtues from which Aquinas’s more extensive list flows. These virtues are prudence, justice, temperance, and courage (ST IaIIae 61.2). Aquinas refers to these virtues as the “cardinal” virtues. They are the principle habits on which the rest of the virtues hinge (cardo) (Rickaby, 2003). To put the matter another way, each cardinal virtue refers to a general type of rectitude that has various specifications. For example, the virtue of prudence (which we will consider in more detail shortly) denotes a “certain rectitude of discretion in any actions or matters whatever” (ST IaIIae 61.4; 61.3). Any virtue the point of which is to promote discretion with respect to action will be considered a part of prudence. Similarly, temperance concerns the moderation of passion, and thus will include any virtue that seeks to restrain those desires of a more or less insatiable sort (Ibid.).

Moreover, Aquinas thinks the cardinal virtues provide general templates for the most salient forms of moral activity: commanding action (prudence); giving to those what is due (justice); curbing the passions (temperance); and strengthening the passions against fear (courage) (IaIIae 61.3). A more detailed sketch of these virtues follows (although I will address them in an order that is different from the one Aquinas provides).

a. Prudence

In order to act well, we need to make good judgments about how we should behave. This is precisely the sort of habit associated with prudence, which Aquinas defines as "wisdom concerning human affairs" (STIIaIIae 47.2 ad 1) or “right reason with respect to action” (ST IIaIIae 47.4). In order to make good moral judgments, a twofold knowledge is required: one must know (1) the general moral principles that guide actions and (2) the particular circumstances in which a decision is required. For “actions are about singular matters: and so it is necessary for the prudent man to know both the universal principles of reason, and the singulars about which actions are concerned” (ST IIaIIae 47.3; Cf. STIaIIae 18.3). This passage may appear to suggest that prudence involves a fairly simple and straightforward process of applying moral rules to specific situations. But this is somewhat misleading since the activity of prudence involves a fairly developed ability to evaluate situations themselves. As Thomas Hibbs explains: “prudence involves not simply the subordination of particulars to appropriate universals, but the appraisal of concrete, contingent circumstances” (Hibbs, 2001: 92). From this perspective, good decisions will always be responsive to what our situation requires. Thus we cannot simply consult a list of moral prescriptions in determining what we should do. We must also “grasp what is pertinent and to assess what ought to be done in complex circumstances” (Ibid., 98).

According to Aquinas, then, the virtue of prudence is a kind of intellectual aptitude that enables us to make judgments that are consonant with (and indeed ordered to) our proper end (ST IaIIae 57.5). Note here that prudence does not establish the end at which we aim. Our end is the human good, which is predetermined by our rational nature (ST IIaIIae 47.6). Nor does prudence desire that end; for whether we desire our proper end depends on whether we have the rights sorts of appetitive inclinations (as we shall see below). According to Aquinas, prudence illuminates for us the course of action deemed most appropriate for achieving our antecedently established telos. It does this through three acts: (1) counsel, whereby we inquire about the available means of achieving the end; (2) judgment, whereby we determine the proper means for achieving the end; and finally (3) command, whereby we apply that judgment (ST IIaIIae 47.8). While we need a range of appetitive excellences in order to make good choices, we also need certain intellectual excellences as well. That is, we must be able to deliberate and choose well with respect to what is ultimately good for us.

As a cardinal virtue, prudence functions as a principle virtue on which a variety of other excellences hinge. Those excellences include: memory, intelligence, docility, shrewdness, reason, foresight, circumspection, and caution (ST IIaIIae 49.1-8).  Without these excellences, we may commit a number of cognitive errors that may prevent us from acting in a morally appropriate way. For example, we may reject the guidance of good counsel; make decisions precipitously; or act thoughtlessly by failing "to judge rightly through contempt or neglect of those things on which a right judgment depends" (ST IIaIIae 53.4). We may also act for the sake of goods that are contrary to our nature. This invariably happens when the passions cloud our judgment and make deficient objects of satisfaction look more choiceworthy than they really are. In order to make reliable judgments about what is really good, our passions need some measure of restraint so that they do not corrupt good judgment. In short, prudence depends on virtues of the appetite, and it is to these virtues we now turn.

b. Temperance

Temperance has a twofold meaning. In a general sense, the term denotes a kind of moderation common to every moral virtue (ST IIaIIae 141.2). In its more restricted sense, temperance concerns the moderation of physical pleasures, especially those associated with eating, drinking, and sex (ST IIaIIae 141.4). We display a common propensity to sacrifice our well-being for the sake of these transient goods. Thus we need some virtue that serves to restrain what Aquinas calls “concupiscible passion” –the appetite whereby we desire what is pleasing and avoid what is harmful (ST Ia 82.2). Temperance is that virtue, as it denotes a restrained desire for physical gratification (ST IIaIIae 141.2, 3).

Aquinas does not think that temperance eradicates our desire for bodily pleasure. Nor does he think that temperance is a matter of desiring physical pleasure less. Such a description suggests that physical gratification is an innately deficient type of enjoyment. Yet Aquinas denies this. Physical pleasure, he says, is the result of the body’s natural operations (ST IIaIIae 141.4). According to Aquinas, the purpose of temperance is to refine the way we enjoy bodily pleasures. Specifically, it creates in the agent a proper sense of moderation with respect to what is pleasurable. For a person can more easily subordinate herself to reason when her passions are not excessive or deficient. On this view, bodily enjoyment can in fact be an integral part of a rational life. For the moderated enjoyment of bodily pleasure safeguards the good of reason and actually facilitates a more enduring kind of satisfaction. Thus Aquinas insists that “sensible and bodily goods … are not in opposition to reason, but are subject to it as instruments which reason employs in order to attain its proper end” (ST IIaIIae 141.3).

Like prudence, temperance is a cardinal virtue. There are a host of subsidiary virtues that fall under temperance because they serve to modify the most insatiable human passions. For example, chastity,sobriety and abstinence—which denote a retrenchment of sex, drink, and food, respectively—are (predictably) all parts of temperance. Yet there are other virtues associated with temperance that may strike the reader as surprising. For example, Aquinas argues that humility is a part of temperance. Humility aims to restrain the immoderate desire for what one cannot achieve. While humility is not concerned with tempering the appetites associated with touch, it nevertheless consists in a kind of restraint and thus bears a formal resemblance to temperance. He says: “whatever virtues restrain or suppress, and the actions which moderate the impetuosity of the passions, are considered parts of temperance” (ST IIaIIae 161.4). Thus Aquinas also thinks meeknessclemency, and studiousness are parts of temperance. They, too, restrain certain appetitive drives: specifically anger, the desire to punish, and the desire to pursue vain curiosities, respectively.

c. Courage

Temperance and its subsidiary virtues restrain the strong appetite, such as the sexual appetite But courage and its subsidiary virtues modify what Aquinas calls the irascible appetite. By “irascible appetite” Aquinas means the desire for that which is difficult to attain or avoid (ST IaIIae 23.1). Occasionally, the difficulty in achieving or avoiding certain objects can give rise to various degrees of fear and, in turn, discourage us from adhering to reason’s instruction. In these cases we may refuse to endure the pain or discomfort required for achieving our proper human good. Note here that fear is not innately contrary to reason. After all, there are some things that we should fear, like an untimely death or a bad reputation. Only when fear prevents us from facing what we ought to endure does it become inimical to reason (ST IIaIIae 125.1). In these cases, we need a virtue that moderates those appetites that prevent from undertaking more daunting tasks. According to Aquinas, courage is that virtue.

We need courage to restrain our fears so that we might endure harrowing circumstances. Yet courage not only mollifies our fears, it also combats the unreasonable zeal to overcome them. An excessive desire to face fearful circumstances constitutes a kind of recklessness that can easily hasten one’s demise. Thus we need courage in order to both curb excessive fear and modify unreasonable daring (ST IIaIIae 123.3). Without courage, we will be either governed by irrational fear or a recklessness that eschews good counsel, making us vulnerable to harm unnecessarily.

Like prudence and temperance, courage is a cardinal virtue. Those with courage will also have a considerable degree of endurance. For one must be able to “stand immovable in the midst of dangers,” especially those dangers that threaten bodily harm and death (ST IIaIIae 123.6). Lack of endurance will no doubt undermine one’s ability to bear life’s travails. The courageous person must also be confident (which is closely aligned with magnanimity). For he will not only have to endure pain and suffering, he must aggressively confront the obstacles that stand in the way of achieving his proper good. His success in confronting those obstacles requires that he exercise a “strength of hope” which arises from a confidence in his own strength, the strength of others, or the promises of God. Such hope enables him to confront threats and challenges without reservation (ST IIaIIae 129.6). The courageous person will also display magnificence, that is, a sense of nobility with respect to the importance of his endeavors. Quoting Tully, Aquinas underscores the value of what the courageous person seeks to attain by executing his actions with a “greatness of purpose” (ST IIaIIae 128.1). Finally, the courageous person will havepatience and perseverance. That is, he will not be broken by stress or sorrow, nor will he be wearied or discouraged due to the exigencies of his endeavors (Ibid.).

d. Justice

The virtues we have considered thus far concern our own state. The virtue of justice, however, governs our relationships with others (ST IIaIIae 57.1). Specifically, it denotes a sustained or constant willingness to extend to each person what he or she deserves (ST IIaIIae 58.1). Beyond this, Aquinas’s account of justice exhibits considerable breadth, complexity, and admits of various distinctions. Constraints of space, however, force me to mention only two sets of distinctions: (1) legal (or general) and particular justice, and (2) commutative and distributive justice.

The purpose of legal justice is to govern our actions according to the common good (ST IIaIIae 58.6). Construed this way, justice is a general virtue which concerns not individual benefits but community welfare. According to Aquinas, everyone who is a member of a community stands to that community as a part to a whole (ST IIaIIae 58.5). Whatever affects the part also affects the whole. And so whatever is good (or harmful) for oneself will also be good (or harmful) for the community of which one is a part. For this reason, we should expect the good community to enact laws that will govern its members in ways that are beneficial to everyone. This focus—the welfare of the community—is what falls under the purview of legal justice.

A clarification is in order. Aquinas acknowledges that legal justice does not appear to be altogether different from the virtues we previously considered. After all, courage, temperance, and prudence are just as likely to contribute to others’ welfare as legal justice. Yet these virtues differ logically from legal justice because they have specific objects of their own (ST IIaIIae 58.6). Whereas legal justice concerns the common good, prudence concerns commanding action, temperance concerns curbing concupiscent passion, and courage concerns strengthening irascible passion against fear. To put the matter as baldly as possible, the purpose of the other virtues is to make us good people; making us good citizens is the end at which legal justice aims (Ibid., sed contra). Of course, it would be a mistake to conclude from this account that the other virtues have nothing to do with the common good. Failure to moderate our baser appetites not only forestalls the development of personal virtue but leads to acts which are contrary to others’ well being. For example, restraining impetuous sexual appetite is the province of temperance. But as Thomas Williams insightfully points out, “sexuality [also] has implications for the common good.” For “there are precepts of justice that regulate our sex lives: fornication and adultery are violations not only of chastity but also of justice” (Williams, 2005: xvii). Thus Aquinas insists that temperance can do more than just modify our sexual drives. So long as it is shaped or informed by legal justice, temperance can direct us to preserve the common good in our actions (ST IIaIIae 58.6). We can say the same for prudence and courage. Legal justice must govern all acts of virtue to ensure that they achieve their end in a way that is commensurate with the good of others.

Now, we cannot fulfill the demands of justice only by considering what legal (or general) justice requires. We also need particular justice—the virtue which governs our interactions with individual citizens. Unlike general justice, particular justice directs us not to the good of the community but to the good of individual neighbors, colleagues, and other people with whom we interact regularly. Initially, it may appear as if particular justice is a superfluous virtue. As one objection to Aquinas’s view states, “general justice directs man sufficiently in all his relations with other men. Therefore there is no need for a particular justice” (ST IIaIIae 58.7 obj. 1). Aquinas agrees that general justice can direct us to the good of others, but only indirectly (ST IIaIIae 58.7 ad 1). It does this by providing us with very general precepts (do not steal, do not murder, etc) the point of which is to help us preserve the common good in our actions. Yet no situation requiring justice is the same, and thus our considerations of what is just must extend beyond what these general precepts dictate. We must be mindful of individual needs and judicious when applying these precepts. This is why Aquinas insists that the proximate concern of particular justice cannot be the common good but the good of individuals (Ibid.). In fulfilling its purpose, however, particular justice is a means of preserving community welfare.

Following Aristotle, Aquinas identifies two species of particular justice that deserve attention:commutative and distributive justice. Both seek to preserve equality between persons by giving to each person what is due. Yet Aquinas notes that there are “different kinds of due,” and this fact necessitates the current distinction (ST IIaIIae 61.1 ad 5; ST IIaIIae 61.2 ad 2). Commutative justice concerns the “mutual dealings” between individual citizens (ST IIaIIae 61.1). Specifically, it seeks to ensure that those who are buying and selling conduct their business fairly (In NE V.928). In this context “what is due” is a kind of equality whereby “one person should pay back to the other just so much as he has become richer out of that which belonged to the other” (ST IIaIIae 61.2). In other words, the value of a product should be equal to what one pays for that product. Similarly, a person should be paid an amount that is comparable to the value of what he sells. In short, the kind of equality commutative justice seeks to preserve is a matter of quantity (Ibid; In NE V.950).

Distributive justice concerns the way in which collective goods and responsibilities “are [fairly] apportioned among people who stand in a social community” (In NE V.927). Yet with respect to distributive justice, what a person receives is not a matter of equal quantity but “due proportion” (STIIaIIae 61.2). After all, it would be unjust if “laborers are paid equal wages for doing an unequal amount of work, or are paid unequal wages for doing an equal amount of work” (In NE V 4.935). Aquinas also thinks that a person of higher social station will require a greater proportion of goods (ST IIaIIae 61.2). In matters of distributive justice, then, “what is due” will be relative to what one deserves (or needs, since Aquinas also thinks that there is a moral obligation to provide for the poor) depending on his efforts or station in life.

This brief account of justice may seem like a stale precursor to more modern accounts of justice, particularly those that depict justice in terms of equality and economic fairness. Yet a brief survey of the virtues that hinge on justice reveals an account that is richer than the foregoing paragraphs may suggest. For Aquinas, justice is principally about our relations to others, and so he thinks that “all the virtues that are directed to another person may by reason of this common aspect be annexed to justice” (ST IIaIIae 80.1). The virtues Aquinas has in mind here are not simply those that regulate our relationships with other human beings, but with God. Thus he insists that religion is a virtue that falls under justice, since it involves offering God his due honor (Ibid; ST IIaIIae 81.1). The same can be said for piety andobservance, since they seek to render to God service and deference, respectively. Other virtues annexed to justice include truthfulness, since the just person will always present himself to others without pretext or falsehood; gratitude, which involves an appreciation for others’ kindness; and revenge, whereby we respond to or defend ourselves against others’ injurious actions (Ibid.). Finally, Aquinas includes bothliberality and friendship as parts of justice. The former is a virtue whereby we benefit others by giving or sharing with them the goods we possess (ST IIaIIae 117.1, 2, and 5). The latter involves treating those who live among us well (ST IIaIIae 114.2).

4. Natural Law

Aquinas is often described as a natural law theorist. While natural law is a significant aspect of his moral philosophy, it is a subject of considerable dispute and misunderstanding. Of course, this is not the place to adjudicate competing interpretations of Aquinas’s view. Yet recent philosophers have noted that too many expositors distort Aquinas’s view by treating it independently of his metaethics and his theory of virtue (see for example MacIntyre, 1990: 133-135; Hibbs, 2001: 94). While a detailed analysis of natural law and its varying interpretations would require a separate study, the present article hopes to sketch Aquinas’s view in a way that is sensitive to other aspects of his thought.

What is the natural law? We might attempt to answer this question by considering both the meaning of the term “law” as well as the law’s origin. On Aquinas’s view, a law is “a rule or measure of human acts, whereby a person is induced to act or is restrained from acting” (ST IaIIae 90.1). Elsewhere, he describes a law as a “dictate of practical reason emanating from a ruler” (ST IaIIae 91.1). At a very general level, then, a law is a precept that serves as a guide to and measure of human action. Thus whether an action is good will depend on whether it conforms to or abides by the relevant law. Here we should recall from an earlier section that, for Aquinas, a human action is good or bad depending on whether it conforms to reason. In other words, reason is the measure by which we evaluate human acts. Thus Aquinas thinks that the laws that govern human action are expressive of reason itself (ST IaIIae 90.1).

Now we will address the law’s origin. According to Aquinas, every law is ultimately derived from what he calls the eternal law (ST IaIIae 93.3). The “eternal law” refers to God’s providential ordering of all created things to their proper end. We participate in that divine order in virtue of the fact that God creates in us both a desire for and an ability to discern what is good (he calls this ability the “light of natural reason”). According to Aquinas, “it is this participation in the eternal law by the rational creature that is called the natural law” (ST IaIIae 91.2; Cf. 93.6). On this view, natural law is but an extension of the eternal law. For by it God ordains us to final happiness by implanting in us both a general knowledge of and inclination for goodness. Note here that the natural law is not an external source of authority. Nor is it a general deontic norm from which more specific precepts are inferred (McInerny, 1993: 211-212; Hibbs, 1988: 61-62). As Aquinas understands it, the natural law is a fundamental principle that is weaved into the fabric of our nature. As such, it illuminates and gives us a desire for those goods that facilitate the kind of flourishing proper to human beings (ST IaIIae 94.3). This point deserves further discussion.

According to Aquinas, human beings have an innate habit whereby they reason according to what he calls “first principles.” First principles are fundamental to all inquiry. They include things like the principle of non-contradiction and law of excluded middle. These principles are indemonstrable in the sense that we do not acquire them from some prior demonstration. To put the matter another way, they are not facts at which we arrive by means of argument or reasoning. They are the principles from which all reasoning proceeds. And while we do not derive them from some prior set of facts, a moment’s reflection would show that they nevertheless provide the conditions for intelligible inquiry. In short, human reasoning does not establish the truth of first principles, it depends on them.

The natural law functions in a way that is analogous to the aforementioned principles. According to Aquinas, all human actions are governed by a general principle or precept that is foundational to and necessary for all practical reasoning: good is to be done and evil is to be avoided. This principle is not something we can ignore or defy. Rather, it is an expression of how practical thought and action proceed in creatures such as ourselves. Whenever we deliberate about how we should act, we do so by virtue of a natural inclination to pursue (or avoid) those goods (or evils) that contribute to (or deter us from) our perfection as human beings. The goods for which we have a natural inclination include life, the procreation and education of offspring, knowledge, and a civil social order (ST IaIIae 94.2). Whether there are additional goods that are emblematic of the natural law will depend on whether they in fact contribute to our rational perfection.

caveat is in order. While we naturally desire goods that facilitate our perfection, excessive passion, unreasonable fear, and self-interest can distort the way we construe those goods (ST IaIIae 94.6). For example, sexual pleasure is a natural good. Yet excessive passion can corrupt our understanding of what sex’s role ought to be in our lives and lead us to pursue short-term sexual pleasure at the expense of more enduring goods. Also, self-protection is a good to which we naturally incline. Yet unreasonable fear may deter us from acting for the sake of goods that trump personal safety. Poor upbringing and the prejudices of society can further undermine a proper view of what human fulfillment consists in. Whether we can make competent judgments about what will contribute to our proper fulfillment depends on whether we have the requisite intellectual and moral virtues. Without those virtues, our intellectual and moral deficiencies will forestall our rational perfection and the attainment of our final end.

5. Charity and Beatitude

The teleological framework that circumscribes Aquinas’s moral philosophy has been evident throughout this essay. Indeed, Aquinas takes Aristotle’s eudaimonism to be amenable to his own theological purposes. Not only does Aquinas agree that human beings seek their own happiness, he agrees that the virtues are necessary for achieving it. Yet there are important differences between Aquinas’s depiction of final happiness and Aristotle’s. While Aquinas thinks that moral perfection is synonymous with achieving our final end, he construes that end in terms of beatitude, or supernatural union with God (ST IIaIIae 17.7; 23.3; 23.7). In keeping with Christian teaching, he also acknowledges that we cannot achieve beatitude solely by means of our own virtuous efforts. Aquinas’s argument for this claim is as follows: the happiness to which we incline is of two sorts—incomplete happiness and complete happiness. Incomplete happiness is a state we achieve by means of our natural human aptitudes. Through them, we can cultivatesome measure of virtue and, in turn, be happier than we would be otherwise. Perfect or complete happiness, however, lies beyond what we are able to achieve on our own. Thus Aquinas insists that “it is necessary for man to receive from God some additional [habits], whereby he may be directed to supernatural happiness” (ST IaIIae 62.1). According to Aquinas, the habits to which he refers here are “infused” or theological virtues. They are given to us graciously by God and direct us to our “final and perfect good” in the same way that the moral virtues direct us to a kind of happiness made possible by the exercise of our natural capacities (ST IaIIae 62.3).

The theological virtues that facilitate perfect happiness are those listed by St. Paul in the second letter to the Corinthians: faith, hope, and charity. Faith is the virtue whereby we assent to the truth of supernaturally revealed principles (Aquinas calls them “articles of faith”). These articles are contained (at least implicitly) in Scripture and serve as the basis of sacred doctrine. The kind of assent Aquinas has in mind here is not a matter of the intellect alone. It also involves the will. For the will is naturally drawn to God’s goodness and commands the intellect to assent to those articles wherein that goodness is described (Stump, 1991: 188; Jenkins, 1997: 190). Thus Aquinas describes the assent of faith as “an act of intellect which assents to the divine truth at the command of the will, [which is] moved by God’s grace” (STIIaIIae 2.9). Hope is the virtue whereby we trust God in obtaining final happiness. But because God is the one in whom final happiness consists (and not simply the one who assists us in achieving it), we must look to God as the good we desire to obtain (ST IIaIIae 17.6 ad 3). Finally, charity is the virtue whereby we love God for his own sake. He amplifies this idea when he (echoing Augustine) says that charity is an appetitive state whereby our appetites are uniformly ordered to God (STIIaIIae 23.3 sed contra). We should also note here that Aquinas thinks that love of neighbor is included in the love of God. For our neighbor is the natural image of God; thus we cannot love God unless we also love our neighbor (STIIaIIae 25.1 and 44.7).

The virtue of charity is especially relevant to Aquinas’s moral philosophy. As we just discussed, our efforts to be virtuous may contribute to our general betterment, but they alone cannot bring us to final happiness (although they can aid us in this regard, as we will see shortly). In fact, Aquinas thinks that the moral virtues remain incomplete and imperfect so long as they fail to direct us to God (ST IaIIae 65.2; ST IIaIIae 23.7). Charity, on the other hand, rectifies our fallen wills; that is, it perfects our deficient inclinations by orienting them toward God as the proper source of our fulfillment.

Moreover, charity affords a supernatural benefit—or gift—that the cardinal virtues could never provide. That benefit is the gift of wisdom. The gift of wisdom should not be confused with the intellectual virtue of the same name. The virtue of wisdom is an intellectual excellence whereby one grasps the fundamental causes of the world’s origin and operation (ST IIaIIae 45.1; SCG I.1.1). Knowledge of those causes may include knowledge of God, who is the highest cause of things. Yet the virtue of wisdom cannot disclose some of the more important aspects of God’s character. By contrast, the gift of wisdom enables us to see that God is the “sovereign good, which is the last end…” (ST IIaIIae 45.1 ad 1). Those who are wise (in the second sense) have a more comprehensive grasp of God’s goodness and can therefore judge and govern human actions according to divine principles (ST IIaIIae 45.3). Understood this way, the gift of wisdom consists not only in a theoretical grasp of divine things, but it also provides one with the normative guidance necessary for ordering one’s life according to Goodness itself (Ibid.).

Charity, then, inclines one to love God, whose goodness is perfect, unchanging, and eternal. Those who seek happiness in God will be more fulfilled than if they sought happiness in some lesser, transient good. That is, they will experience spiritual joy (ST IIaIIae 28.1). They will also experience supernaturalconcord in the sense that their wills will be in harmony with God’s (ST IIaIIae 29.1). What makes this account especially interesting for our purposes is that it provides us with a more explicit understanding of the sort of fulfillment in which beatitude consists.

What connection, if any, is there between the infused virtue of charity and the moral virtues we’ve previously discussed? This is an important question. Constraints of space, however, permit us to highlight only two such connections. First, charity transforms the virtues themselves. To employ Aquinas’s parlance, charity provides the form of the virtues (ST IIaIIae 23.8). It does this by determining the end at which the virtues aim. For, “in morals, the form of an act is taken chiefly from the end” (Ibid.). Under the auspices of charity, the moral virtues still have the task of moderating our appetites. The purpose for which they do so, however, is for the sake of God. For if, as Aristotle insists “virtue is the disposition of a perfect thing to that which is best,” then even the moral virtues must in some way direct us to supernatural happiness (ST IIaIIae 23.7). The second connection is a natural extension of the first, and it helps explain why—even with charity—we need the moral virtues. According to Aquinas, it is possible for those who love God to sin against charity, especially when moved by desires or fears of an inordinate nature (ST IIaIIae,2). For this reason we must practice those virtues that curtail sinful inclinations and enable us to yield to charity more easily (ST IaIIae 65.3 ad 1 and 2). In conjunction with charity, the moral virtues actually aid in our journey to final happiness and thus play an important role in our redemption.

This last point nicely reflects the way Aquinas weds Christian moral theology and Aristotelian philosophy. More generally, it exemplifies the way in which Aquinas took faith and reason to be perfectly compatible. Of course, the extent to which Aquinas was faithful to Aristotle in his grand synthesis is a subject that must be left for others to address. This matter aside, it is clear that Aquinas’s endeavor has left us with one of the richer and more enduring accounts of the moral life that philosophy has to offer.

6. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Thomas Aquinas, St. Questiones de vertitate (QDV). 1954. Trans. Robert W. Mulligan, S.J. Henry Regnery Company.
  • Thomas Aquinas, St. Summa contra gentiles (SCG), vol. I. 1975. Trans. Anton Pegis. Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press.
  • Thomas Aquinas, St. Summa contra gentiles (SCG), vol. III. 1975. Trans. Vernon Bourke. Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press.
  • Thomas Aquinas, St. Summa theologiae (ST ). 1981. Trans. Fathers of the English Dominican Province. Westminster: Christian Classics.
  • Thomas Aquinas, St. Commentary on Aristotle’s Nichomachean Ethics (In NE). 1993. Trans. C. I. Litzinger, O. P. Notre Dame, IN: Dumb Ox Books.
  • Thomas Aquinas, St. Questiones de malo (QDM). 1995. Trans. John A. Oesterle and Jean T. Oesterle. Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press.
  • Thomas Aquinas, St. Disputed Questions on the Virtues. 2005. Trans. E.M. Atkins. Eds. E.M. Atkins and Thomas Williams. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Augustine. Confessions. 1993. Trans. F.J. Sheed. Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Ackrill, J. 1980. “Aristotle on Eudaimonia.” In Essays on Aristotle’s Ethics, ed. Amelie Oksenberg Rorty. Berkeley: University of California Press, 1980. Pp. 15-34.
  • Ashmore, Robert B. Jr. 1975. “Aquinas and Ethical Naturalism.” The New Scholasticism 49: 76-86.
  • Brock, Stephen. 1998. Action and Conduct: Thomas Aquinas and the Theory of Action. T & T Clark International.
  • Bourke, Vernon. 1974. “Is Aquinas a Natural Law Theorist?” The Monist 58, No. 1: 52-66.
  • Finnis, John. 1980. Natural Law and Natural Rights. Oxford University Press.
  • Finnis, John. 1998. Aquinas: Moral, Political, and Legal Theory. Oxford University Press.
  • Floyd, Shawn. 1999. “Aquinas on Temperance.” The Modern Schoolman LXXVII: 35-48.
  • Floyd, Shawn. 2004. “How to Cure Self-Deception: An Augustinian Remedy.” Logos: A Journal of Catholic Thought and Culture. 7: 60-86.
  • Gallagher, David. 1991. “Thomas Aquinas on Will as Rational Appetite.” Journal of the History of Philosophy 29: 559-584.
  • Hall, Pamela. 1999. Narrative and the Natural Law: An Interpretation of Thomistic Ethics. Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press.
  • Hibbs, Thomas. 1988. “Against a Cartesian Reading of Intellectus in Aquinas,” The Modern Schoolman LXVI: 55-69.
  • Hibbs, Thomas. 2001. Virtue’s Splendor: Wisdom, Prudence, and the Human Good. New York: Fordham University Press.
  • Jenkins, John. 1997. Knowledge and Faith in Thomas Aquinas. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Liska, Anthony. 1996. Aquinas' Theory of Natural Law: An Analytic Reconstruction. New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Kenny, Anthony. 1998. “Aquinas on Aristotelian Happiness,” in Aquinas' Moral Theory: Essays in Honor of Norman Kretzmann, eds. Scott MacDonald and Eleonore Stump. Ithaca: Cornell University Press. Pp. 15-27.
  • Kretzmann, Norman and Eleonore Stump. 1988. “Being and Goodness,” in Divine and Human Action: Essays in the Metaphysics of Theism, ed. Thomas Morris. Ithaca: Cornell University Press. Pp. 281-312. (My understanding of Aquinas’s metaethics has benefited greatly from this paper).
  • Kynondyk-DeYoung, Rebecca. 2002. “Power Made Perfect in Weakness: Aquinas’s Transformation of the Virtue of Courage.” Medieval Philosophy and Theology 11: 147-180.
  • Kynondyk-DeYoung, Rebecca. 2004. "Resistance to the Demands of Love: Aquinas on Acedia," The Thomist 68: 173-204.
  • MacDonald, Scott. 1990. “Egoistic Rationalism: Aquinas’s Basis for Christian Morality.” In Christian Theism and the Problems of Philosophy, ed. Michael Beaty. Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press. Pp. 327-356.
  • MacDonald, Scott. 1991a. “Introduction: The Relation Between Being and Goodness,” in Being and Goodness: The Concept of the Good in Metaphysics and Philosophical Theology, ed. Scott MacDonald. Ithaca: Cornell University Press. Pp. 1-28.
  • MacDonald, Scott. 1991b. “Ultimate Ends and Practical Reasoning: Aquinas’s Aristotelian Moral Psychology and Anscombe’s Fallacy,” The Philosophical Review C: 31-65.
  • MacDonald, Scott and Eleonore Stump, eds. 1998. Aquinas' Moral Theory: Essays in Honor of Norman Kretzmann, eds. Scott MacDonald and Eleonore Stump. Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. 1981. After Virtue. Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. 1991. Three Rival Versions of Moral Inquiry: Encyclopedia, Genealogy, and Tradition. Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. 1999. Dependent Rational Animals: Why Human Beings Need the Virtues. Open Court Publishing.
  • McClusky, Colleen. 2000. “Happiness and Freedom in Aquinas’s Theory of Action,” Medieval Philosophy and Theology 9: 69-90.
  • McInerny, Ralph. 1993. “Ethics.” In The Cambridge Companion to Aquinas, eds. Norman Kretzmann and Eleonore Stump. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. Pp. 196-216.
  • McInerny, Ralph. 1997. Ethica Thomistica: The Moral Philosophy of Thomas Aquinas. Washington D.C. Catholic University of America Press.
  • Murphy, Mark. 2001. Natural Law and Practical Rationality. Cambridge University Press.
  • Murphy, Mark. 2002. "The Natural Law Tradition in Ethics", The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Winter 2002 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.).
  • Nelson, Daniel Mark. 1994. Virtue and Natural Law in Thomas Aquinas and the Implications for Modern Ethics. Pennsylvania State University Press.
  • Pieper, Josef. 1966. The Four Cardinal Virtues. Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press.
  • Pasnau, Robert. 2002. Thomas Aquinas on Human Nature: A Philosophical Study of Summa theologiae Ia 75-89. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Porter, Jean. 1989. “De Ordine Caritiatis: Charity, Friendship, and Justice in Thomas Aquinas’ Summa Theologiae.” The Thomist 53: 197-213.
  • Porter, Jean. 1990. The Recovery of Virtue: The Relevance of Aquinas for Christian Ethics. Louisville: Westminster, John Knox.
  • Rickaby, John. 2003. “Cardinal Virtues,” Catholic Encyclopedia (2003 Online Edition).
  • Stump, Eleonore. 1991. “Aquinas on Faith and Goodness,” in MacDonald 1991a. Pp. 179-207.
  • Stump, Eleonore. 1998. “Wisdom: Will, Belief, and Moral Goodness,” in MacDonald and Stump. Pp. 28-62.
  • Stump, Eleonore. 2003. Aquinas. New York: Routledge.
  • Westberg, Daniel. 1994. Right Practical Reason: Aristotle, Action, and Prudence in Aquinas. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Williams, Thomas. 2005. “Introduction,” in Disputed Questions on the Virtues. Trans. E.M. Atkins. Eds. E.M. Atkins and Thomas Williams. Pp. ix-xxx.

Author Information

Shawn Floyd
Malone College
U. S. A.

René Descartes:
The Mind-Body Distinction

descarteOne of the deepest and most lasting legacies of Descartes’ philosophy is his thesis that mind and body are really distinct—a thesis now called "mind-body dualism." He reaches this conclusion by arguing that the nature of the mind (that is, a thinking, non-extended thing) is completely different from that of the body (that is, an extended, non-thinking thing), and therefore it is possible for one to exist without the other. This argument gives rise to the famous problem of mind-body causal interaction still debated today: how can the mind cause some of our bodily limbs to move (for example, raising one's hand to ask a question), and how can the body’s sense organs cause sensations in the mind when their natures are completely different? This article examines these issues as well as Descartes’ own response to this problem through his brief remarks on how the mind is united with the body to form a human being. This will show how these issues arise because of a misconception about Descartes’ theory of mind-body union, and how the correct conception of their union avoids this version of the problem. The article begins with an examination of the term “real distinction” and of Descartes’ probable motivations for maintaining his dualist thesis.

Table of Contents

  1. What is a Real Distinction?
  2. Why a Real Distinction?
    1. The Religious Motivation
    2. The Scientific Motivation
  3. The Real Distinction Argument
    1. The First Version
    2. The Second Version
  4. The Mind-Body Problem
  5. Descartes’ Response to the Mind-Body Problem
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. What is a Real Distinction?

It is important to note that for Descartes “real distinction” is a technical term denoting the distinction between two or more substances (see Principles, part I, section 60). A substance is something that does not require any other creature to exist—it can exist with only the help of God’s concurrence—whereas, a mode is a quality or affection of that substance (see Principles part I, section 5). Accordingly, a mode requires a substance to exist and not just the concurrence of God. Being sphere shaped is a mode of an extended substance. For example, a sphere requires an object extended in three dimensions in order to exist: an unextended sphere cannot be conceived without contradiction. But a substance can be understood to exist alone without requiring any other creature to exist. For example, a stone can exist all by itself. That is, its existence is not dependent upon the existence of minds or other bodies; and, a stone can exist without being any particular size or shape. This indicates for Descartes that God, if he chose, could create a world constituted by this stone all by itself, showing further that it is a substance “really distinct” from everything else except God. Hence, the thesis that mind and body are really distinct just means that each could exist all by itself without any other creature, including each other, if God chose to do it. However, this does not mean that these substances do exist separately. Whether or not they actually exist apart is another issue entirely.

2. Why a Real Distinction?

A question one might ask is: what's the point of arguing that mind and body could each exist without the other? What’s the payoff for going through all the trouble and enduring all the problems to which it gives rise? For Descartes the payoff is twofold. The first is religious in nature in that it provides a rational basis for a hope in the soul’s immortality [because Descartes presumes that the mind and soul are more or less the same thing]. The second is more scientifically oriented, for the complete absence of mentality from the nature of physical things is central to making way for Descartes’ version of the new, mechanistic physics. This section investigates both of these motivating factors.

a. The Religious Motivation

In his Letter to the Sorbonne published at the beginning of his seminal work, Meditations on First Philosophy, Descartes states that his purpose in showing that the human mind or soul is really distinct from the body is to refute those “irreligious people” who only have faith in mathematics and will not believe in the soul's immortality without a mathematical demonstration of it. Descartes goes on to explain how, because of this, these people will not pursue moral virtue without the prospect of an afterlife with rewards for virtue and punishments for vice. But, since all the arguments in the Meditations—including the real distinction arguments— are for Descartes absolutely certain on a par with geometrical demonstrations, he believes that these people will be obliged to accept them. Hence, irreligious people will be forced to believe in the prospect of an afterlife. However, recall that Descartes’ conclusion is only that the mind or soul can exist without the body. He stops short of demonstrating that the soul is actually immortal. Indeed, in the Synopsis to the Mediations, Descartes claims only to have shown that the decay of the body does not logically or metaphysically imply the destruction of the mind: further argumentation is required for the conclusion that the mind actually survives the body's destruction. This would involve both “an account of the whole of physics” and an argument showing that God cannot annihilate the mind. Yet, even though the real distinction argument does not go this far, it does, according to Descartes, provide a sufficient foundation for religion, since the hope for an afterlife now has a rational basis and is no longer a mere article of faith.

b. The Scientific Motivation

The other motive for arguing that mind and body could each exist without the other is more scientifically oriented, stemming from Descartes’ intended replacement of final causal explanations in physics thought to be favored by late scholastic-Aristotelian philosophers with mechanistic explanations based on the model of geometry. Although the credit for setting the stage for this scholastic-Aristotelian philosophy dominant at Descartes’ time should go to Thomas Aquinas (because of his initial, thorough interpretation and appropriation of Aristotle’s philosophy), it is also important to bear in mind that other thinkers working within this Aristotelian framework such as Duns Scotus, William of Ockham, and Francisco Suarez, diverged from the Thomistic position on a variety of important issues. Indeed, by Descartes’ time, scholastic positions divergent from Thomism became so widespread and subtle in their differences that sorting them out was quite difficult. Notwithstanding this convoluted array of positions, Descartes understood one thesis to stand at the heart of the entire tradition: the doctrine that everything ultimately behaved for the sake of some end or goal. Though these “final causes,” as they were called, were not the only sorts of causes recognized by scholastic thinkers, it is sufficient for present purposes to recognize that Descartes believed scholastic natural philosophers used them as principles for physical explanations. For this reason, a brief look at how final causes were supposed to work is in order.

Descartes understood all scholastics to maintain that everything was thought to have a final cause that is the ultimate end or goal for the sake of which the rest of the organism was organized. This principle of organization became known as a thing’s “substantial form,” because it was this principle that explained why some hunk of matter was arranged in such and such a way so as to be some species of substance. For example, in the case of a bird, say, the swallow, the substantial form of swallowness was thought to organize matter for the sake of being a swallow species of substance. Accordingly, any dispositions a swallow might have, such as the disposition for making nests, would then also be explained by means of this ultimate goal of being a swallow; that is, swallows are disposed for making nests for the sake of being a swallow species of substance. This explanatory scheme was also thought to work for plants and inanimate natural objects.

A criticism of the traditional employment of substantial forms and their concomitant final causes in physics is found in the Sixth Replies where Descartes examines how the quality of gravity was used to explain a body’s downward motion:

But what makes it especially clear that my idea of gravity was taken largely from the idea I had of the mind is the fact that I thought that gravity carried bodies toward the centre of the earth as if it had some knowledge of the centre within itself (AT VII 442: CSM II 298).

On this pre-Newtonian account, a characteristic goal of all bodies was to reach its proper place, namely, the center of the earth. So, the answer to the question, “Why do stones fall downward?” would be, “Because they are striving to achieve their goal of reaching the center of the earth.” According to Descartes, this implies that the stone must have knowledge of this goal, know the means to attain it, and know where the center of the earth is located. But, how can a stone know anything? Surely only minds can have knowledge. Yet, since stones are inanimate bodies without minds, it follows that they cannot know anything at all—let alone anything about the center of the earth.

Descartes continues on to make the following point:

But later on I made the observations which led me to make a careful distinction between the idea of the mind and the ideas of body and corporeal motion; and I found that all those other ideas of . . . 'substantial forms' which I had previously held were ones which I had put together or constructed from those basic ideas (AT VII 442-3: CSM II 298).

Here, Descartes is claiming that the concept of a substantial form as part of the entirely physical world stems from a confusion of the ideas of mind and body. This confusion led people to mistakenly ascribe mental properties like knowledge to entirely non-mental things like stones, plants, and, yes, even non-human animals. The real distinction of mind and body can then also be used to alleviate this confusion and its resultant mistakes by showing that bodies exist and move as they do without mentality, and as such principles of mental causation such as goals, purposes (that is, final causes), and knowledge have no role to play in the explanation of physical phenomena. So the real distinction of mind and body also serves the more scientifically oriented end of eliminating any element of mentality from the idea of body. In this way, a clear understanding of the geometrical nature of bodies can be achieved and better explanations obtained.

3. The Real Distinction Argument

Descartes formulates this argument in many different ways, which has led many scholars to believe there are several different real distinction arguments. However, it is more accurate to consider these formulations as different versions of one and the same argument. The fundamental premise of each is identical: each has the fundamental premise that the natures of mind and body are completely different from one another.

The First Version

The first version is found in this excerpt from the Sixth Meditation:

[O]n the one hand I have a clear and distinct idea of myself, in so far as I am simply a thinking, non-extended thing [that is, a mind], and on the other hand I have a distinct idea of body, in so far as this is simply an extended, non-thinking thing. And accordingly, it is certain that I am really distinct from my body, and can exist without it (AT VII 78: CSM II 54).

Notice that the argument is given from the first person perspective (as are the entire Meditations). This “I” is, of course, Descartes insofar as he is a thinking thing or mind, and the argument is intended to work for any “I” or mind. So, for present purposes, it is safe to generalize the argument by replacing “I” with “mind” in the relevant places:

  1. I have a clear and distinct idea of the mind as a thinking, non-extended thing.
  2. I have a clear and distinct idea of body as an extended, non-thinking thing.
  3. Therefore, the mind is really distinct from the body and can exist without it.

At first glance it may seem that, without justification, Descartes is bluntly asserting that he conceives of mind and body as two completely different things, and that from his conception, he is inferring that he (or any mind) can exist without the body. But this is no blunt, unjustified assertion. Much more is at work here: most notably what is at work is his doctrine of clear and distinct ideas and their veridical guarantee. Indeed the truth of his intellectual perception of the natures of mind and body is supposed to be guaranteed by the fact that this perception is “clear and distinct.” Since the justification for these two premises rests squarely on the veridical guarantee of whatever is “clearly and distinctly” perceived, a brief side trip explaining this doctrine is in order.

Descartes explains what he means by a “clear and distinct idea” in his work Principles of Philosophy at part I, section 45. Here he likens a clear intellectual perception to a clear visual perception. So, just as someone might have a sharply focused visual perception of something, an idea is clear when it is in sharp intellectual focus. Moreover, an idea is distinct when, in addition to being clear, all other ideas not belonging to it are completely excluded from it. Hence, Descartes is claiming in both premises that his idea of the mind and his idea of the body exclude all other ideas that do not belong to them, including each other, and all that remains is what can be clearly understood of each. As a result, he clearly and distinctly understands the mind all by itself, separately from the body, and the body all by itself, separately from the mind.

According to Descartes, his ability to clearly and distinctly understand them separately from one another implies that each can exist alone without the other. This is because “[e]xistence is contained in the idea or concept of every single thing, since we cannot conceive of anything except as existing. Possible or contingent existence is contained in the concept of a limited thing...” (AT VII 166: CSM II 117). Descartes, then, clearly and distinctly perceives the mind as possibly existing all by itself, and the body as possibly existing all by itself. But couldn't Descartes somehow be mistaken about his clear and distinct ideas? Given the existence of so many non-thinking bodies like stones, there is no question that bodies can exist without minds. So, even if he could be mistaken about what he clearly and distinctly understands, there is other evidence in support of premise 2. But can minds exist without bodies? Can thinking occur without a brain? If the answer to this question is “no,” the first premise would be false and, therefore, Descartes would be mistaken about one of his clear and distinct perceptions. Indeed, since we have no experience of minds actually existing without bodies as we do of bodies actually existing without minds, the argument will stand only if Descartes’ clear and distinct understanding of the mind’s nature somehow guarantees the truth of premise 1; but, at this point, it is not evident whether Descartes’ “clear and distinct” perception guarantees the truth of anything.

However, in the Fourth Meditation, Descartes goes to great lengths to guarantee the truth of whatever is clearly and distinctly understood. This veridical guarantee is based on the theses that God exists and that he cannot be a deceiver. These arguments, though very interesting, are numerous and complex, and so they will not be discussed here. Suffice it to say that since Descartes believes he has established God’s inability to deceive with absolute, geometrical certainty, he would have to consider anything contradicting this conclusion to be false. Moreover, Descartes claims that he cannot help but believe clear and distinct ideas to be true. However, if God put a clear and distinct idea in him that was false, then he could not help but believe a falsehood to be true and, to make matters worse, he would never be able to discover the mistake. Since God would be the author of this false clear and distinct idea, he would be the source of the error and would, therefore, be a deceiver, which must be false. Hence, all clear and distinct ideas must be true, because it is impossible for them to be false given God’s non-deceiving nature.

That said, the clarity and distinctness of Descartes’ understanding of mind and body guarantees the truth of premise 1. Hence, both “clear and distinct” premises are not blunt, unjustified assertions of what he believes but have very strong rational support from within Descartes’ system. However, if it turns out that God does not exist or that he can be a deceiver, then all bets are off. There would then no longer be any veridical guarantee of what is clearly and distinctly understood and, as a result, the first premise could be false. Consequently, premise 1 would not bar the possibility of minds requiring brains to exist and, therefore, this premise would not be absolutely certain as Descartes supposed. In the end, the conclusion is established with absolute certainty only when considered from within Descartes’ own epistemological framework but loses its force if that framework turns out to be false or when evaluated from outside of it.

These guaranteed truths express some very important points about Descartes’ conception of mind and body. Notice that mind and body are defined as complete opposites. This means that the ideas of mind and body represent two natures that have absolutely nothing in common. And, it is this complete diversity that establishes the possibility of their independent existence. But, how can Descartes make a legitimate inference from his independent understanding of mind and body as completely different things to their independent existence? To answer this question, recall that every idea of limited or finite things contains the idea of possible or contingent existence, and so Descartes is conceiving mind and body as possibly existing all by themselves without any other creature. Since there is no doubt about this possibility for Descartes and given the fact that God is all powerful, it follows that God could bring into existence a mind without a body and vice versa just as Descartes clearly and distinctly understands them. Hence, the power of God makes Descartes’ perceived logical possibility of minds existing without bodies into a metaphysical possibility. As a result, minds without bodies and bodies without minds would require nothing besides God’s concurrence to exist and, therefore, they are two really distinct substances.

The Second Version

The argument just examined is formulated in a different way later in the Sixth Meditation:

[T]here is a great difference between the mind and the body, inasmuch as the body is by its very nature always divisible, while the mind is utterly indivisible. For when I consider the mind, or myself in so far as I am merely a thinking thing, I am unable to distinguish any parts within myself; I understand myself to be something quite single and complete….By contrast, there is no corporeal or extended thing that I can think of which in my thought I cannot easily divide into parts; and this very fact makes me understand that it is divisible. This one argument would be enough to show me that the mind is completely different from the body…. (AT VII 86-87: CSM II 59).

This argument can be reformulated as follows, replacing “mind” for “I” as in the first version:

  1. I understand the mind to be indivisible by its very nature.
  2. I understand body to be divisible by its very nature.
  3. Therefore, the mind is completely different from the body.

Notice the conclusion that mind and body are really distinct is not explicitly stated but can be inferred from 3. What is interesting about this formulation is how Descartes reaches his conclusion. He does not assert a clear and distinct understanding of these two natures as completely different but instead makes his point based on a particular property of each. However, this is not just any property but a property each has “by its very nature.” Something’s nature is just what it is to be that kind of thing, and so the term “nature” is here being used as synonymous with “essence.” On this account, extension constitutes the nature or essence of bodily kinds of things; while thinking constitutes the nature or essence of mental kinds of things. So, here Descartes is arguing that a property of what it is to be a body, or extended thing, is to be divisible, while a property of what it is to be a mind or thinking thing is to be indivisible.

Descartes’ line of reasoning in support of these claims about the respective natures of mind and body runs as follows. First, it is easy to see that bodies are divisible. Just take any body, say a pencil or a piece of paper, and break it or cut it in half. Now you have two bodies instead of one. Second, based on this line of reasoning, it is easy to see why Descartes believed his nature or mind to be indivisible: if a mind or an “I” could be divided, then two minds or “I’s” would result; but since this “I” just is my self, this would be the same as claiming that the division of my mind results in two selves, which is absurd. Therefore, the body is essentially divisible and the mind is essentially indivisible: but how does this lead to the conclusion that they are completely different?

Here it should be noted that a difference in just any non-essential property would have only shown that mind and body are not exactly the same. But this is a much weaker claim than Descartes’ conclusion that they are completely different. For two things could have the same nature, for example, extension, but have other, changeable properties or modes distinguishing them. Hence, these two things would be different in some respect, for example, in shape, but not completely different, since both would still be extended kinds of things. Consequently, Descartes needs their complete diversity to claim that he has completely independent conceptions of each and, in turn, that mind and body can exist independently of one another.

Descartes can reach this stronger conclusion because these essential properties are contradictories. On the one hand, Descartes argues that the mind is indivisible because he cannot perceive himself as having any parts. On the other hand, the body is divisible because he cannot think of a body except as having parts. Hence, if mind and body had the same nature, it would be a nature both with and without parts. Yet such a thing is unintelligible: how could something both be separable into parts and yet not separable into parts? The answer is that it can’t, and so mind and body cannot be one and the same but two completely different natures. Notice that, as with the first version, mind and body are here being defined as opposites. This implies that divisible body can be understood without indivisible mind and vice versa. Accordingly each can be understood as existing all by itself: they are two really distinct substances.

However, unlike the first version, Descartes does not invoke the doctrine of clear and distinct ideas to justify his premises. If he had, this version, like the first, would be absolutely certain from within Descartes’ own epistemological system. But if removed from this apparatus, it is possible that Descartes is mistaken about the indivisibility of the mind, because the possibility of the mind requiring a brain to exist would still be viable. This would mean that, since extension is part of the nature of mind, it would, being an extended thing, be composed of parts and, therefore, it would be divisible. As a result, Descartes could not legitimately reach the conclusion that mind and body are completely different. This would also mean that the further, implicit conclusion that mind and body are really distinct could not be reached either. In the end, the main difficulty with Descartes’ real distinction argument is that he has not adequately eliminated the possibility of minds being extended things like brains.

4. The Mind-Body Problem

The real distinction of mind and body based on their completely diverse natures is the root of the famous mind-body problem: how can these two substances with completely different natures causally interact so as to give rise to a human being capable of having voluntary bodily motions and sensations? Although several versions of this problem have arisen over the years, this section will be exclusively devoted to the version of it Descartes confronted as expressed by Pierre Gassendi, the author of the Fifth Objections, and Descartes’ correspondent, Princess Elizabeth of Bohemia. Their concern arises from the claim at the heart of the real distinction argument that mind and body are completely different or opposite things.

The complete diversity of their respective natures has serious consequences for the kinds of modes each can possess. For instance, in the Second Meditation, Descartes argues that he is nothing but a thinking thing or mind, that is, Descartes argues that he is a “thing that doubts, understands, affirms, denies, is willing, is unwilling, and also imagines and has sensory perceptions” (AT VII 28: CSM II 19). It makes no sense to ascribe such modes to entirely extended, non-thinking things like stones, and therefore, only minds can have these kinds of modes. Conversely, it makes no sense to ascribe modes of size, shape, quantity and motion to non-extended, thinking things. For example, the concept of an unextended shape is unintelligible. Therefore, a mind cannot be understood to be shaped or in motion, nor can a body understand or sense anything. Human beings, however, are supposed to be combinations of mind and body such that the mind’s choices can cause modes of motion in the body, and motions in certain bodily organs, such as the eye, cause modes of sensation in the mind.

The mind’s ability to cause motion in the body will be addressed first. Take for example a voluntary choice, or willing, to raise one’s hand in class to ask a question. The arm moving upward is the effect while the choice to raise it is the cause. But willing is a mode of the non-extended mind alone, whereas the arm’s motion is a mode of the extended body alone: how can the non-extended mind bring about this extended effect? It is this problem of voluntary bodily motion or the so-called problem of “mind to body causation” that so troubled Gassendi and Elizabeth. The crux of their concern was that in order for one thing to cause motion in another, they must come into contact with one another as, for example, in the game of pool the cue ball must be in motion and come into contact with the eight-ball in order for the latter to be set in motion. The problem is that, in the case of voluntarily bodily movements, contact between mind and body would be impossible given the mind’s non-extended nature. This is because contact must be between two surfaces, but surface is a mode of body, as stated at Principles of Philosophy part II, section 15. Accordingly, the mind does not have a surface that can come into contact with the body and cause it to move. So, it seems that if mind and body are completely different, there is no intelligible explanation of voluntary bodily movement.

Although Gassendi and Elizabeth limited themselves to the problem of voluntary bodily movement, a similar problem arises for sensations, or the so-called problem of “body to mind causation.” For instance, a visual sensation of a tree is a mode of the mind alone. The cause of this mode would be explained by the motion of various imperceptible bodies causing parts of the eye to move, then movements in the optic nerve, which in turn cause various “animal spirits” to move in the brain and finally result in the sensory idea of the tree in the mind. But how can the movement of the “animal spirits,” which were thought to be very fine bodies, bring about the existence of a sensory idea when the mind is incapable of receiving modes of motion given its non-extended nature? Again, since the mind is incapable of having motion and a surface, no intelligible explanation of sensations seems possible either. Therefore, the completely different natures of mind and body seem to render their causal interaction impossible.

The consequences of this problem are very serious for Descartes, because it undermines his claim to have a clear and distinct understanding of the mind without the body. For humans do have sensations and voluntarily move some of their bodily limbs and, if Gassendi and Elizabeth are correct, this requires a surface and contact. Since the mind must have a surface and a capacity for motion, the mind must also be extended and, therefore, mind and body are not completely different. This means the “clear and distinct” ideas of mind and body, as mutually exclusive natures, must be false in order for mind-body causal interaction to occur. Hence, Descartes has not adequately established that mind and body are two really distinct substances.

5. Descartes’ Response to the Mind-Body Problem

Despite the obviousness of this problem, and the amount of attention given to it, Descartes himself never took this issue very seriously. His response to Gassendi is a telling example:

These questions presuppose amongst other things an explanation of the union between the soul and the body, which I have not yet dealt with at all. But I will say, for your benefit at least, that the whole problem contained in such questions arises simply from a supposition that is false and cannot in any way be proved, namely that, if the soul and the body are two substances whose nature is different, this prevents them from being able to act on each other (AT VII 213: CSM II 275).

So, Descartes’ response to the mind-body problem is twofold. First, Descartes contends that a response to this question presupposes an explanation of the union between the mind (or soul) and the body. Second, Descartes claims that the question itself stems from the false presupposition that two substances with completely different natures cannot act on each other. Further examination of these two points will occur in reverse order.

Descartes’ principles of causation put forward in the Third Meditation lie at the heart of this second presupposition. The relevant portion of this discussion is when Descartes argues that the less real cannot cause something that is more real, because the less real does not have enough reality to bring about something more real than itself. This principle applies on the general level of substances and modes. On this account, an infinite substance, that is, God, is the most real thing because only he requires nothing else in order to exist; created, finite substances are next most real, because they require only God’s creative and conservative activity in order to exist; and finally, modes are the least real, because they require a created substance and an infinite substance in order to exist. So, on this principle, a mode cannot cause the existence of a substance since modes are less real than finite substances. Similarly, a created, finite substance cannot cause the existence of an infinite substance. But a finite substance can cause the existence of another finite substance or a mode (since modes are less real than substances). Hence, Descartes’ point could be that the completely diverse natures of mind and body do not violate this causal principle, since both are finite substances causing modes to exist in some other finite substance. This indicates further that the “activity” of the mind on the body does not require contact and motion, thereby suggesting that mind and body do not bear a mechanistic causal relation to each other. More will be said about this below.

The first presupposition concerns an explanation of how the mind is united with the body. Descartes’ remarks about this issue are scattered across both his published works and his private correspondence. These texts indicate that Descartes did not maintain that voluntary bodily movements and sensation arise because of the causal interaction of mind and body by contact and motion. Rather, he maintains a version of the form-matter theory of soul-body union endorsed by some of his scholastic-Aristotelian predecessors and contemporaries. Although a close analysis of the texts in question cannot be conducted here, a brief summary of how this theory works for Descartes can be provided.

Before providing this summary, however, it is important to disclaim that this scholastic-Aristotelian interpretation is a minority position amongst Descartes scholars. The traditional view maintains that Descartes’ human being is composed of two substances that causally interact in a mechanistic fashion. This traditional view led some of Descartes’ successors, such as Malebranche and Leibniz (who also believed in the real distinction of mind and body), to devise metaphysical systems wherein mind and body do not causally interact despite appearances to the contrary. Other philosophers considered the mind-body problem to be insurmountable, thereby denying their real distinction: they claim that everything is either extended (as is common nowadays) or mental (as George Berkeley argued in the 18th century). Indeed, this traditional, mechanistic interpretation of Descartes is so deeply ingrained in the minds of philosophers today, that most do not even bother to argue for it. However, a notable exception is Marleen Rozemond, who argues for the incompatibility of Descartes’ metaphysics with any scholastic-Aristotelian version of mind or soul-body union. Those interested in closely examining her arguments should consult her book Descartes’s Dualism. A book arguing in favor of the scholastic-Aristotelian interpretation is entitled Descartes and the Metaphysics of Human Nature; Chapter 5 specifically addresses Rozemond’s concerns.

Two major stumbling blocks Rozemond raises for the scholastic-Aristotelian interpretation concern the mind’s status as a substantial form and the extent to which Descartes can maintain a form of the human body. However, recall that Descartes rejects substantial forms because of their final causal component. Descartes’ argument was based on the fact (as he understood it) that the scholastics were ascribing mental properties to entirely non-mental things like stones. Since the mind is an entirely mental thing, these arguments just do not apply to it. Hence, Descartes’ particular rejection of substantial forms does not necessarily imply that Descartes did not view the mind as a substantial form. Indeed, as Paul Hoffman noted:

Descartes really rejects the attempt to use the human soul as a model for explanations in the entirely physical world. This makes it possible that Descartes considered the human mind to be the only substantial form. At first glance this may seem ad hoc but it is also important to notice that rejecting the existence of substantial forms with the exception of the mind or rational soul was not uncommon amongst Descartes’ contemporaries.

Although the mind’s status as a substantial form may seem at risk because of its meager explicit textual support, Descartes suggests that the mind a “substantial form” twice in a draft of open letter to his enemy Voetius:

Yet, if the soul is recognized as merely a substantial form, while other such forms consist in the configuration and motion of parts, this very privileged status it has compared with other forms shows that its nature is quite different from theirs (AT III 503: CSMK 207-208).

Descartes then remarks “this is confirmed by the example of the soul, which is the true substantial form of man” (AT III 508: CSMK 208). Although other passages do not make this claim explicitly, they do imply (in some sense) that the mind is a substantial form. For instance, Descartes claims in a letter to Mesland dated 9 February 1645, that the soul is “substantially united” with the human body (AT IV 166: CSMK 243). This “substantial union” was a technical term amongst the scholastics denoting the union between a substantial form and matter to form a complete substance. Consequently, there is some reason for believing that the human mind is the only substantial form left standing in Descartes’ metaphysics.

Another major stumbling block recognized by Rozemond is the extent to which, if any, Descartes’ metaphysics can maintain a principle for organizing extension into a human body. This was a point of some controversy amongst the scholastics themselves. Philosophers maintaining a Thomistic position argued that the human soul is the human body’s principle of organization. While others, maintaining a basically Scotistic position, argued that some other form besides the human soul is the form of the body. This “form of corporeity” organizes matter for the sake of being a human body but does not result in a full-fledged human being. Rather it makes a body with the potential for union with the human soul. The soul then actualizes this potential resulting in a complete human being. If Descartes did hold a fundamentally scholastic theory of mind-body union, then is it more Thomistic or Scotistic? Since intellect and will are the only faculties of the mind, it does not have the faculty for organizing matter for being a human body. So, if Descartes’ theory is scholastic, it must be most in line with some version of the Scotistic theory. Rozemond argues that Descartes’ rejection of all other substantial forms (except the human mind or soul) precludes this kind of theory since he cannot appeal to the doctrine of substantial forms like the Scotists.

Although Descartes argues that bodies, in the general sense, are constituted by extension, he also maintains that species of bodies are determined by the configuration and motion of their parts. This doctrine of “configuration and motion of parts” serves the same purpose as the doctrine of substantial forms with regards to entirely physical things. But the main difference between the two is that Descartes’ doctrine does not employ final causes. Recall that substantial forms organize matter for the purpose of being a species of thing. The purpose of a human body endowed with only the form of corporeity is union with the soul. Hence, the organization of matter into a human body is an effect that is explained by the final cause or purpose of being disposed for union. But, on Descartes’ account, the explanatory order would be reversed: a human body’s disposition for union is an effect resulting from the configuration and motion of parts. So, even though Descartes does not have recourse to substantial forms, he still has recourse to the configuration of matter and to the dispositions to which it gives rise, including “all the dispositions required to preserve that union” (AT IV 166: CSMK 243). Hence, on this account, Descartes gets what he needs, namely, Descartes gets a body properly configured for potential union with the mind, but without recourse to the scholastic notion of substantial forms with their final causal component.

Another feature of this basically Scotistic position is that the soul and the body were considered incomplete substances themselves, while their union results in one, complete substance. Surely Descartes maintains that mind and body are two substances but in what sense, if any, can they be considered incomplete? Descartes answers this question in the Fourth Replies. He argues that a substance may be complete insofar as it is a substance but incomplete insofar as it is referred to some other substance together with which it forms yet some third substance. This can be applied to mind and body as follows: the mind insofar as it is a thinking thing is a complete substance, while the body insofar as it is an extended thing is a complete substance, but each taken individually is only an incomplete human being.

This account is repeated in the following excerpt from a letter to Regius dated December 1641:

For there you said that the body and the soul, in relation to the whole human being, are incomplete substances; and it follows from their being incomplete that what they constitute is a being through itself (that is, an ens per se; AT III 460: CSMK 200).

The technical sense of the term “being through itself” was intended to capture the fact that human beings do not require any other creature but only God’s concurrence to exist. Accordingly, a being through itself, or ens per se, is a substance. Also notice that the claim in the letter to Regius that two incomplete substances together constitute a being through itself is reminiscent of Descartes’ remarks in the Fourth Replies. This affinity between the two texts indicates that the union of mind and body results in one complete substance or being through itself. This just means that mind and body are the metaphysical parts (mind and body are incomplete substances in this respect) that constitute one, whole human being, which is a complete substance in its own right. Hence, a human being is not the result of two substances causally interacting by means of contact and motion, as Gassendi and Elizabeth supposed, but rather they bear a relation of act and potency that results in one, whole and complete substantial human being.

This sheds some light on why Descartes thought that an account of mind-body union would put Gassendi’s and Elizabeth’s concerns to rest: they misconceived the union of mind and body as a mechanical relation when in fact it is a relation of act and potency. This avoids Gassendi’s and Elizabeth’s version of this problem. This aversion is accomplished by the fact that modes of voluntary motion (and sensations, by extrapolation) should be ascribed to a whole human being and not to the mind or the body taken individually. This is made apparent in a 21 May 1643 letter to Elizabeth where Descartes distinguishes between various “primitive notions.” The most general are the notions of being, number, duration, and so on, which apply to all conceivable things. He then goes on to distinguish the notions of mind and body:

Then, as regards body in particular, we have only the notion of extension, which entails the notions of shape and motion; and as regards the soul on its own, we have only the notion of thought, which includes the perceptions of the intellect and the inclinations of the will (AT III 665: CSMK 218).

Here body and soul (or mind) are primitive notions and the notions of their respective modes are the notions “entailed by” or “included in” these primitives. Descartes then discusses the primitive notion of mind-body union:

Lastly, as regards the soul and the body together, we have only the notion of their union, on which depends our notion of the soul’s power to move the body, and the body’s power to act on the soul and cause its sensations and passions (AT III 665: CSMK 218).

In light of the immediately preceding lines, this indicates that voluntary bodily movements and sensations are not modes of the body alone, or the mind alone, but rather are modes of “the soul and the body together.” This is at least partially confirmed in the following lines from Principles, part I, article 48:

But we also experience within ourselves certain other things, which must not be referred either to the mind alone or to the body alone. These arises, as will be made clear in the appropriate place, from the close and intimate union of our mind with the body. This list includes, first, appetites like hunger and thirds; secondly, the emotions or passions . . . (AT VIIIA 23: CSM I 209).

These texts indicate that the mind or soul is united with the body so as to give rise to another whole complete substance composed of these two metaphysical parts. And, moreover, this composite substance now has the capacity for having modes of its own, namely, modes of voluntary bodily movement and sensation, which neither the mind nor the body can have individually. So, voluntary bodily movements are not modes of the body alone caused by the mind, nor are sensations modes of the mind alone caused by the body. Rather, both are modes of a whole and complete human being. On this account, it makes no sense to ask how the non-extended mind can come into contact with the body to cause these modes. To ask this would be to get off on the wrong foot entirely, since contact between these two completely diverse substances is not required for these modes to exist. Rather all that is necessary is for the mind to actualize the potential in a properly disposed human body to form one, whole, human being to whom is attributed modes of voluntary movement and sensation.

Although the scholastic-Aristotelian interpretation avoids the traditional causal interaction problem based on the requirements of contact and motion, it does run up against another version of that problem, namely, a problem of formal causation. This is a problem facing any scholastic-Aristotelian theory of mind or soul-body union where the soul is understood to be an immaterial substantial form. Recall that the immaterial mind or soul as substantial form is suppose to act on a properly disposed human body in order to result in a full-fledged human being. The problem of formal causal interaction is: how can an immaterial soul assubstantial form act on the potential in a material thing? Can any sense be made of the claim that a non-extended or immaterial things acts on anything? Descartes noticed in a letter to Regius (AT III 493: CSMK 206) that the scholastics did not try to answer this question and so he and Regius need not either. The likely explanation of their silence is that the act-potency relation was considered absolutely fundamental to scholastic-Aristotelian philosophy and, therefore, it required no further explanation. So, in the end, even if Descartes’ theory is as described here, it does not evade all the causal problems associated with uniting immaterial souls or mind to their respective bodies. , However, if this proposed account is true, it helps to cast Descartes’ philosophy in a new light and to redirect the attention of scholars to the formal causal problems involved.

6. References and Further Reading

Primary Sources

  • Descartes, Rene, Ouevres de Descartes, 11 vols., eds. Charles Adam and Paul Tannery, Paris: Vrin, 1974-1989.
    • This is still the standard edition of all of Descartes’ works and correspondence in their original languages. Cited in the text as AT, volume, page.
  • Descartes, Rene, The Philosophical Writings of Descartes, 3 vols., trans. John Cottingham, Robert Stoothoff, Dugald Murdoch and Anthony Kenny, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1984-1991
    • This is the standard English translation of Descartes philosophical works and correspondence. Cited in the text as CSM or CSMK, volume, page.

Secondary Sources

  • Broughton, Janet and Mattern, Ruth, “Reinterpreting Descartes on the Notion of the Union of Mind and Body,” Journal of the History of Philosophy 16 (1978), 23-32.
    • A reinterpretation of the notion of mind-body union in the correspondence with Elizabeth, which addresses Radner’s interpretation of it. See below.
  • Garber, Daniel, “Understanding Interaction: What Descartes Should Have Told Elizabeth,” Southern Journal of Philosophy, Supp. 21 (1983), 15-32.
    • Article addressing the issues of the primitive notions and how this theory should be used to explain mind-body causal interaction to Elizabeth.
  • Hoffman, Paul, “The Unity of Descartes’ Man,” The Philosophical Review 95 (1986), 339-369.
    • Article arguing that Descartes’ theory of mind-body union is more in line with scholastic-Aristotelian theories of soul-body union than previously supposed.
  • Kenny, Anthony, Descartes: A Study of His Philosophy, New York: Random House, 1968. See especially chapters 4 and 10.
    • These chapters provide classic interpretations of the real distinction between mind and body and the mind-body problem.
  • Mattern, Ruth, “Descartes’ Correspondence with Elizabeth Concerning both the Union and Distinction of Mind and Body” in Descartes: Critical and Interpretive Essays, ed. Michael Hooker, Baltimore: John Hopkins University Press, 1978, 212-222.
    • Short essay examining Descartes’ correspondence with Elizabeth on this issue and how it was supposed to direct her to a correct understanding of mind-body causal interaction.
  • Radner, Daisie, “Descartes’ Notion of the Union of Mind and Body,” Journal of the History of Philosophy 9 (1971), 159-170.
    • This is the first article in Anglo-American scholarship to address the issue of mind-body union. It addresses several texts, including the letter to Elizabeth enumerating the primitive notions.
  • Rozemond, Marleen, Descartes’s Dualism, Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1998.
    • This book argues for a particular understanding of the real distinction between mind and body that would preclude Hoffman’s scholastic-Aristotelian account of their union.
  • Skirry, Justin, Descartes and the Metaphysics of Human Nature, London and New York: Thoemmes-Continuum Press, 2005.
    • This book takes issue with Rozemond’s account of the mind-body union through a close re-examination of fundamental features of Descartes’ metaphysics and by building on certain features of Hoffman’s account.
  • Voss, Stephen, “Descartes: The End of Anthropology” in Reason, Will and Sensation, ed. John Cottingham, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1994.
    • This essay provides a close textual analysis of Descartes’ account of the union of mind and body on the supposition that he maintained a Platonic rather than scholastic-Aristotelian theory of mind-body union.
  • Williams, Bernard, Descartes: The Project of Pure Enquiry, Sussex: Harvester Press, 1978. See especially chapter 4.
    • This is another classic account of the mind-body relation in Descartes.
  • Wilson, Margaret, Descartes, London and Boston: Routledge and Kegan Paul, 1978.
    • Provides classic accounts of the real distinction argument and issues concerning mind-body causal interaction.

Author Information

Justin Skirry
U. S. A.

Diogenes of Sinope (c. 404—323 B.C.E.)

diogenes_of_sinopeThe most illustrious of the Cynic philosophers, Diogenes of Sinope serves as the template for the Cynic sage in antiquity. An alleged student of Antisthenes, Diogenes maintains his teacher’s asceticism and emphasis on ethics, but brings to these philosophical positions a dynamism and sense of humor unrivaled in the history of philosophy. Though originally from Sinope, the majority of the stories comprising his philosophical biography occur in Athens, and some of the most celebrated of these place Alexander the Great or Plato as his foil.It is disputed whether Diogenes left anything in writing. If he did, the texts he composed have since been lost. In Cynicism, living and writing are two components of ethical practice, but Diogenes is much like Socrates and even Plato in his sentiments regarding the superiority of direct verbal interaction over the written account. Diogenes scolds Hegesias after he asks to be lent one of Diogenes’ writing tablets: “You are a simpleton, Hegesias; you do not choose painted figs, but real ones; and yet you pass over the true training and would apply yourself to written rules” (Diogenes Laertius, Lives of Eminent Philosophers, Book 6, Chapter 48). In reconstructing Diogenes’ ethical model, then, the life he lived is as much his philosophical work as any texts he may have composed.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Philosophical Practice: A Socrates Gone Mad
  3. References and Further Reading

1. Life

The exceptional nature of Diogenes’ life generates some difficulty for determining the exact events that comprise it. He was a citizen of Sinope who either fled or was exiled because of a problem involving the defacing of currency. Thanks to numismatic evidence, the adulteration of Sinopean coinage is one event about which there is certainty. The details of the defacing, though, are murkier: “Diocles relates that [Diogenes] went into exile because his father was entrusted with the money of the state and adulterated the coinage. But Eubulides in his book on Diogenes says that Diogenes himself did this and was forced to leave home along with his father” (Diogenes Laertius, Lives of Eminent Philosophers, Book 6, Chapter 20). Whether it was Diogenes or his father who defaced the currency, and for whatever reasons they may have done so, the act lead to Diogenes’ relocation to Athens.

Diogenes’ biography becomes, historically, only sketchier. For example, one story claims that Diogenes was urged by the oracle at Delphi to adulterate the political currency, but misunderstood and defaced the state currency (Diogenes Laertius, Lives of Eminent Philosophers, Book 6, Chapter 20). A second version tells of Diogenes traveling to Delphi and receiving this same oracle after he had already altered the currency, turning his crime into a calling. It is, finally, questionable whether Diogenes ever consulted the oracle at all; the Delphic advice is curiously close to Socrates’ own injunction, and the interweaving of life and legend in Diogenes’ case is just as substantial.

Once in Athens, Diogenes famously took a tub, or a pithos, for an abode. In Lives of Eminent Philosophers, it is reported that Diogenes “had written to some one to try and procure a cottage for him. When this man was a long time about it, he took for his abode the tub in the Metroön, as he himself explains in his letters” (Diogenes Laertius, Book 6, Chapter 23). Apparently Diogenes discovered that he had no need for conventional shelter or any other “dainties” from having watched a mouse. The lesson the mouse teaches is that he is capable of adapting himself to any circumstance. This adaptability is the origin of Diogenes’ legendary askēsis, or training.

Diogenes Laertius reports that Diogenes of Sinope “fell in” with Antisthenes who, though not in the habit of taking students, was worn out by Diogenes’ persistence (Lives of Eminent Philosophers, Book 6, Chapter 22). Although this account has been met with suspicion, especially given the likely dates of Diogenes’ arrival in Athens and Antisthenes’ death, it supports the perception that the foundation of Diogenes’ philosophical practice rests with Antisthenes.

Another important, though possibly invented, episode in Diogenes’ life centers around his enslavement in Corinth after having been captured by pirates. When asked what he could do, he replied “Govern men,” which is precisely what he did once bought by Xeniades. He was placed in charge of Xeniades’ sons, who learned to follow his ascetic example. One story tells of Diogenes’ release after having become a cherished member of the household, another claims Xeniades freed him immediately, and yet another maintains that he grew old and died at Xeniades’ house in Corinth. Whichever version may be true (and, of course, they all could be false), the purpose is the same: Diogenes the slave is freer than his master, who he rightly convinces to submit to his obedience.

Though most accounts agree that he lived to be quite old— some suggesting he lived until ninety— the tales of Diogenes’ death are no less multiple than those of his life. The possible cause of death includes a voluntary demise by holding his breath, an illness brought on by eating raw octopus, or death by dog bite. Given the embellished feel of each of these reports, it is more likely that he died of old age.

2. Philosophical Practice: A Socrates Gone Mad

When Plato is asked what sort of man Diogenes is, he responds, “A Socrates gone mad” (Diogenes Laertius, Book 6, Chapter 54). Plato’s label is representative, for Diogenes’ adaptation of Socratic philosophy has frequently been regarded as one of degradation. Certain scholars have understood Diogenes as an extreme version of Socratic wisdom, offering a fascinating, if crude, moment in the history of ancient thought, but which ought not to be confused with the serious business of philosophy. This reading is influenced by the mixture of shamelessness and askēsis which riddle Diogenes’ biography. This understanding, though, overlooks the centrality of reason in Diogenes’ practice.

Diogenes’ sense of shamelessness is best seen in the context of Cynicism in general. Specifically, though, it stems from a repositioning of convention below nature and reason. One guiding principle is that if an act is not shameful in private, that same act is not made shameful by being performed in public. For example, it was contrary to Athenian convention to eat in the marketplace, and yet there he would eat for, as he explained when reproached, it was in the marketplace that he felt hungry. The most scandalous of these sorts of activities involves his indecent behavior in the marketplace, to which he responded “he wished it were as easy to relieve hunger by rubbing an empty stomach” (Diogenes Laertius, Lives of Eminent Philosophers, Book 6, Chapter 46).

He is labeled mad for acting against convention, but Diogenes points out that it is the conventions which lack reason: “Most people, he would say, are so nearly mad that a finger makes all the difference. For if you go along with your middle finger stretched out, some one will think you mad, but, if it’s the little finger, he will not think so” (Diogenes Laertius, Lives of Eminent Philosophers, Book 6, Chapter 35). In these philosophical fragments, reason clearly has a role to play. There is a report that Diogenes “would continually say that for the conduct of life we need right reason or a halter” (Diogenes Laertius, Lives of Eminent Philosophers, Book 6, Chapter 24). For Diogenes, each individual should either allow reason to guide her conduct, or, like an animal, she will need to be lead by a leash; reason guides one away from mistakes and toward the best way in which to live life. Diogenes, then, does not despise knowledge as such, but despises pretensions to knowledge that serve no purpose.

He is especially scornful of sophisms. He disproves an argument that a person has horns by touching his forehead, and in a similar manner, counters the claim that there is no such thing as motion by walking around. He elsewhere disputes Platonic definitions and from this comes one of his more memorable actions: “Plato had defined the human being as an animal, biped and featherless, and was applauded. Diogenes plucked a fowl and brought it into the lecture-room with the words, ‘Here is Plato’s human being.’ In consequence of which there was added to the definition, ‘having broad nails’” (Diogenes Laertius, Lives of Eminent Philosophers, Book 6, Chapter 40). Diogenes is a harsh critic of Plato, regularly disparaging Plato’s metaphysical pursuits and thereby signaling a clear break from primarily theoretical ethics.

Diogenes’ talent for undercutting social and religious conventions and subverting political power can tempt readers into viewing his position as merely negative. This would, however, be a mistake. Diogenes is clearly contentious, but he is so for the sake of promoting reason and virtue. In the end, for a human to be in accord with nature is to be rational, for it is in the nature of a human being to act in accord with reason. Diogenes has trouble finding such humans, and expresses his sentiments regarding his difficulty theatrically. Diogenes is reported to have “lit a lamp in broad daylight and said, as he went about, ‘I am searching for a human being’” (Diogenes Laertius, Lives of Eminent Philosophers, Book 6, Chapter 41).

For the Cynics, life in accord with reason is lived in accord with nature, and therefore life in accord with reason is greater than the bounds of convention and the polis. Furthermore, the Cynics claim that such a life is the life worth living. As a homeless and penniless exile, Diogenes experienced the greatest misfortunes of which the tragedians write, and yet he insisted that he lived the good life: “He claimed that to fortune he could oppose courage, to convention nature, to passion reason” (Diogenes Laertius, Lives of Eminent Philosophers, Book 6, Chapter 38).

3. References and Further Reading

  • Billerbeck, Margarethe. Die Kyniker in der modernen Forschung. Amsterdam: B.R. Grüner, 1991.
  • Branham, Bracht and Marie-Odile Goulet-Cazé, eds. The Cynics: The Cynic Movement in Antiquity and Its Legacy. Berkeley: University of California Press, 1996.
  • Dudley, D. R. A History of Cynicism from Diogenes to the 6th Century A.D. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1937.
  • Goulet-Cazé, Marie-Odile. L’Ascèse cynique: Un commentaire de Diogène Laërce VI 70-71, Deuxième édition. Paris: Libraire Philosophique J. VRIN, 2001.
  • Goulet-Cazé, Marie-Odile and Richard Goulet, eds. Le Cynisme ancien et ses prolongements. Paris: Presses Universitaires de France, 1993.
  • Diogenes Laertius. Lives of Eminent Philosophers Vol. I-II. Trans. R.D. Hicks. Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1979.
  • Long, A.A. and David N. Sedley, eds. The Hellenistic Philosophers, Volume 1 and Volume 2. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1987.
  • Malherbe, Abraham J., ed. and trans. The Cynic Epistles. Missoula, Montana: Scholars Press, 1977.
  • Navia, Luis E. Diogenes of Sinope: The Man in the Tub. Westport, Connecticut: Greenwood Press, 1990.
  • Navia, Luis E. Classical Cynicism: A Critical Study. Westport, Connecticut: Greenwood Press, 1996.
  • Paquet, Léonce. Les Cyniques grecs: fragments et témoignages. Ottawa: Presses de l’Universitaire d’Ottawa, 1988.

Author Information

Julie Piering
University of Arkansas at Little Rock
U. S. A.


Cynicism originates in the philosophical schools of ancient Greece that claim a Socratic lineage. To call the Cynics a “school” though, immediately raises a difficulty for so unconventional and anti-theoretical a group. Their primary interests are ethical, but they conceive of ethics more as a way of living than as a doctrine in need of explication. As such askēsis—a Greek word meaning a kind of training of the self or practice—is fundamental. The Cynics, as well as the Stoics who followed them, characterize the Cynic way of life as a “shortcut to virtue” (see Diogenes Laertius, Lives of Eminent Philosophers, Book 6, Chapter 104 and Book 7, Chapter 122). Though they often suggest that they have discovered the quickest, and perhaps surest, path to the virtuous life, they recognize the difficulty of this route.

The colorfulness of the Cynic way of life presents certain problems. The triumph of the Cynic as a philosophical and literary character complicates discussions of the historical individuals, a complication further troubled by a lack of sources. The evidence regarding the Cynics is limited to apothegms, aphorisms, and ancient hearsay; none of the many Cynic texts have survived. The tradition records the tenets of Cynicism via their lives. It is through their practices, the selves and lives that they cultivated, that we come to know the particular Cynic ēthos.

Table of Contents

  1. History of the Name
  2. Major Figures and the Cynic Lineage
  3. Cynic Ethics
    1. Living in Accord with Nature and Opposing Conventions
      1. Freedom and Parrhēsia
      2. Training and Toughness
  4. Cosmopolitanism
  5. The Cynic Legacy
  6. References and Further Reading

1. History of the Name

The origin of the Cynic name kunikos, a Greek word meaning “dog-like”, is a point of contention. Two competing stories explain the source of the name using the figure of Antisthenes (who Diogenes Laertius identifies controversially as the original Cynic), and yet a third explanation uses the figure of Diogenes of Sinope. First, Antisthenes is said to have taught in the Cynosarges, which is a Greek word that might mean “White Dog,” “Quick Dog,” or even “Dog’s Meat”. The Cynosarges is a gymnasium and temple for Athenian nothoi. "Nothoi" is a term that designates one who is without Athenian citizenship because of being born to a slave, foreigner, or prostitute; one can also be nothoi if one’s parents were citizens but not legally married. According to the first explanation, the term Cynic would, then, derive from the place in which the movement’s founder worshipped, exercised, and, most importantly, lectured. Such a derivation is suspect insofar as later writers could have created the story through an analogy to the way in which the term “Stoic” came from the Stoa Poikilē in which Zeno of Citium taught. Though nothing unquestionably links Antisthenes or any other Cynic to the Cynosarges, Antisthenes was a nothos and the temple was used for worshipping Hercules, the ultimate Cynic hero.

A second possible derivation comes from Antisthenes’ alleged nickname Haplokuōn, a word that probably means a dog “pure and simple”, and is presumably referring to his way of living. Though Antisthenes was known for a certain rudeness and crudeness that could have led to such a name, and later authors, including Aelian, Epictetus, and Stobaeus, identify him as a kuōn, or dog, his contemporaries, such as Plato and Xenophon, do not label him as such. This lack lends some credence to the notion that the term kunikos was applied to Antisthenes posthumously, and only after Diogenes of Sinope, a more illustrious philosopher-dog, had arrived on the scene.

If Antisthenes was not the first Cynic by name, then the origin of the appellation falls to Diogenes of Sinope, an individual well known for dog-like behavior. As such, the term may have begun as an insult referring to Diogenes’ style of life, especially his proclivity to perform all of his activities in public. Shamelessness, which allowed Diogenes to use any space for any purpose, was primary in the invention of “Diogenes the Dog.”

The precise source of the term “Cynic” is, however, less important than the wholehearted appropriation of it. The first Cynics, beginning most clearly with Diogenes of Sinope, embraced their title: they barked at those who displeased them, spurned Athenian etiquette, and lived from nature. In other words, what may have originated as a disparaging label became the designation of a philosophical vocation.

Finally, because Cynicism denotes a way of living, it is inaccurate to equate Cynicism with the other schools of its day. The Cynics had no set space where they met and discoursed, such as the Garden, the Lyceum, or the Academy; for Diogenes and Crates, the streets of Athens provide the setting for both their teaching and their training. Moreover, the Cynics neglect, and very often ridicule, speculative philosophy. They are especially harsh critics of dogmatic thought, theories they consider useless, and metaphysical essences.

2. Major Figures and the Cynic Lineage

The major figures within Cynicism form the pivotal points within a lineage traced from Antisthenes, Socrates’ companion and a major interlocutor in the Socratic dialogues of Xenophon (see especially his Memorabilia and Symposium), through his student, Diogenes of Sinope, to Diogenes’ pupil Crates, and from Crates to both Hipparchia of Maronea, the first known woman Cynic philosopher, and Zeno of Citium, the founder of Stoicism.

Some others among the more notable Cynics include Metrocles of Maronea, brother to Hipparchia and pupil of Crates, Menippus, Demonax of Cyprus, Bion of Borysthenes, and Teles. Thinkers heavily influenced by Cynic thought include Zeno of Citium, Cleanthes of Assos, Aristo of Chios, Musonius Rufus, Epictetus, Dio Chrysostom, and the emperor Julian.

The Socratic schools tend to trace their lineage directly back to Socrates and the Cynics are no exception. As such, the historical authenticity of this heredity is suspect. Nevertheless, it accurately tracks a kind of intellectual transmission that begins with Antisthenes and is passed on to Diogenes, Crates, and Zeno. Cynics seem to have survived into the third century CE; two of Julian’s orations from 361 CE disparage the Cynics of his day for lacking the asceticism and hardiness of “real” Cynics. As a “school” of thought, Cynicism ends in the sixth century CE, but its legacy continues in both philosophy and literature.

3. Cynic Ethics

Foremost for understanding the Cynic conception of ethics is that virtue is a life lived in accord with nature. Nature offers the clearest indication of how to live the good life, which is characterized by reason, self-sufficiency, and freedom. Social conventions, however, can hinder the good life by compromising freedom and setting up a code of conduct that is opposed to nature and reason. Conventions are not inherently bad; however, for the Cynic, conventions are often absurd and worthy of ridicule. The Cynics deride the attention paid to the Olympics, the “big thieves” who run the temples and are seen carrying away the “little thieves” who steal from them, politicians as well as the philosophers who attend their courts, fashion, and prayers for such things as fame and fortune.

Only once one has freed oneself from the strictures that impede an ethical life can one be said to be truly free. As such, the Cynics advocate askēsis, or practice, over theory as the means to free oneself from convention, promote self-sufficiency, and live in accord with nature. Such askēsis leads the Cynic to live in poverty, embrace hardship and toil, and permits the Cynic to speak freely about the silly, and often vicious, way life is lived by his or her contemporaries. The Cynics consistently undermine the most hallowed principles of Athenian culture, but they do so for the sake of replacing them with those in accord with reason, nature, and virtue.

a. Living in Accord with Nature and Opposing Conventions

Though the imperative to live life in accord with nature is rightly associated with Stoicism, the Stoics are following a Cynic lead. Diogenes of Sinope fervently rejects nomos, or convention, by showing the arbitrary and frequently amusing nature of Athenian social, religious, and political mores and trampling the authority of religious and political leaders. Fundamental to this is a redefinition of what is worthy of shame. Diogenes’ body is disorderly, a source of great shame among the Athenians and the reservoir for the principle of shamelessness among the Cynics.

Diogenes uses his body to upend the conventional association of decorum with the good. He breaks etiquette by publicly carrying out activities an Athenian would typically perform in private. For example, he eats, drinks, and masturbates in the marketplace, and ridicules the shame felt when one’s body is unruly or clumsy. This does not mean, however, that there is nothing about which a person ought to feel shame. For example, in Lives of Emminent Philosophers, one finds the following anecdote: “Observing a fool tuning a harp, ‘Are you not ashamed,’ he said, ‘to give this wood concordant sounds, while you fail to harmonize your soul with your life?’ To one who protested ‘I am unfit to study philosophy,’ Diogenes said, ‘Why then live, if you do not care to live well?’” (Diogenes Laertius, Book 6, Chapter 65; R.D. Hicks’ translation is altered for this article.)

As Diogenes ’ reappraisal of shame suggests, the Cynics are not relativists. Nature replaces convention as the standard for judgment. The Cynics believe that it is through nature that one can live well and not through conventional means such as etiquette or religion. One reads that Diogenes of Sinope “would rebuke men in general with regard to their prayers, declaring that they asked for things which seemed to them to be good, not for such as are truly good” (Diogenes Laertius, Lives of Eminent Philosophers, Book 6, Chapter 43). This captures the crux of the Cynic notion of living in accord with nature and contrary to convention. Praying for wealth, fame, or any of the other trappings convention leads one to believe are good is a mistaken enterprise. Life, as given by nature, is full of hints as to how to live it best; but humans go astray, ashamed by petty things and striving after objects, which are unimportant. Consequently, their freedom is hindered by convention.

i. Freedom and Parrhēsia

The Cynics clearly privilege freedom, but not merely in a personal sense as a kind of negative liberty. Instead, freedom is advocated in three related forms: eleutheria, freedom or liberty, autarkeia, self-sufficiency, and parrhēsia, freedom of speech or frankness. Their conception of freedom has some shared aspects with other ancient schools; the notion of autonomy which derives from the imperative that reason rule over the passions is found in the ethics of multiple Classical and Hellenistic thinkers. A specifically Cynic sense of freedom, though, is evident in parrhēsia.

An element of parrhēsia, which can be overlooked when it is defined as free or frank speech, is the risk that accompanies speaking so freely and frankly. Legendary examples of the Cynic’s fearlessly free speech occur in Diogenes of Sinope’s interchanges with Alexander the Great. One such example is the following: “When he was sunning himself in the Craneum, Alexander came and stood over him and said, ‘Ask of me any boon you like.’ To which he replied, ‘Stand out of my light’” (Diogenes Laertius, Lives of Eminent Philosophers, Book 6, Chapter 28). At another point, Alexander pronounces his rank to Diogenes of Sinope by saying, “I am Alexander the Great King.” Diogenes responds with his own rank, “I am Diogenes the Cynic,” which is to say “Diogenes the Dog” (Diogenes Laertius, Lives of Eminent Philosophers, Book 6, Chapter 60).

The examples above demonstrate the unique confluence of humor, fearless truth telling, and political subversion which distinguishes the Cynic way of living. With a few notable exceptions, the philosophers of antiquity can be found at some time or another in the company of rulers (Plato, Aeschines, and Aristippus all attended the court of Dionysius, Xenophon is intimately associated with Cyrus, Aristotle with the Macedonian ruling family, and so on). The Cynics, however, made it a point to shun such contact. The Cynics strive for self-sufficiency and strength, neither of which is capable of being maintained once one enters into the conventional political game. The life of an impoverished, but virtuous and self-sufficient philosopher is preferable to the life of a pampered court philosopher.

Diogenes Laertius writes that, “Plato saw [Diogenes of Sinope] washing lettuces, came up to him and quietly said to him, ‘Had you paid court to Dionysius, you wouldn’t now be washing lettuces,’ and [Diogenes] with equal calmness answered, ‘If you had washed lettuces, you wouldn’t have paid court to Dionysius’” (Lives of Eminent Philosophers, Book 6, Chapter 58). The lesson of this exchange is clear: whereas Plato views paying court as freeing one from poverty, the Cynic sees poverty as freeing one from having to pay court to a ruler. This second sense of freedom so forcefully advocated by the Cynics, comprises both autarkeia, or self-sufficiency, and parrhēsia, or the freedom to speak the truth: something one at court is never free to do. It is no surprise, then, that when asked what is “the most beautiful thing in the world,” Diogenes replied, “Parrhēsia.” (Diogenes Laertius, Lives of Eminent Philosophers, Book 6, Chapter 69.)

ii. Training and Toughness

In order to live the Cynic life, one had to be inured to the various physical hardships entailed by such freedom. This required, then, a life of constant training, or askēsis. The term askēsis, defined above as a kind of training of the self but which also means “exercise” or “practice,” is appropriated from athletic training. Instead of training the body for the sake of victory in the Olympic Games, on the battlefield, or for general good health, the Cynic trains the body for the sake of the soul.

The examples of Cynic training are multiple: Antisthenes praised toil and hardship as goods; Diogenes of Sinope walked barefoot in the snow, hugged cold statues, and rolled about in the scalding summer sand in his pithos; Crates rid himself of his considerable wealth in order to become a Cynic. The ability to live without any of the commodities usually mistaken for necessities is liberating and beneficial. It is also, however, a difficult lesson: “[Diogenes of Sinope] used to say that he followed the example of the trainers of choruses; for they too set the note a little high, to ensure that the rest should hit the right note” (Diogenes Laertius, Book 6, Chapter 35).

4. Cosmopolitanism

The Cynics are not always given credit when it comes to the notion of cosmopolitanism, for the origin of this term is at times ascribed to Stoicism. Moreover, when it is attributed to Cynicism, it is often characterized as a negative tenet that gains content only once it is transplanted into Stoic doctrine (see John L. Moles’ discussion of “Cynic Cosmopolitanism” in The Cynics). However, cosmopolitanism can be fully understood within its Cynic context if it is taken as more than an oxymoron or a pithy retort: “Asked where he came from, [Diogenes of Sinope] said, ‘I am a citizen of the world [kosmopolitēs]’” (Diogenes Laertius, Book 6, Chapter 63). In this last quote, Diogenes is responding to a question calling for him to state his origin with what seems to be a neologism. To be a politēs is to belong to a polis, to be a member of a specific society with all of the benefits and commitments such membership entails. By not responding with the expected “Sinope,” Diogenes is renouncing his duty to Sinopeans as well as his right to be aided by them. It is important to note that Diogenes does not say that he is apolis, that is, without a polis; he claims allegiance to the kosmos, or the universe.

The Cynics, then, cast the notion of citizenship in a new light. To the Greek male of the Classical and Hellenistic period, citizenship was of utmost value. The restrictions on citizenship made it a privilege and these exclusions are, to the Cynic, absurd. Under cosmopolitanism, the Cynic challenges the civic affiliation of the few by opening the privilege to all. General national affiliation was likewise esteemed, and Diogenes’ cosmopolitan response is therefore also a rejection of the limitations of such a view.

Finally, cosmopolitanism revises the traditional conception of the political duties of an individual. As such, the Cynic is freed to live according to nature and not according to the laws and conventions of the polis. The conventional polis is not just rejected but replaced. This has important ethical connections to the notion of living in accord with nature, and can likewise be seen as an important precursor to the Stoic understanding of physis, or nature, as identical to the kosmos, or universe.

5. The Cynic Legacy

The first and most direct Cynic influence is upon the founding of Stoicism. One story, preserved in Diogenes Laertius, tells of Zeno of Citium reading a copy of Xenophon’s Memorabilia in a bookshop while shipwrecked in Athens. He became so taken with the figure of Socrates that he asked the bookseller where he might find such a man. At just that moment, Crates passed by, and the bookseller pointed him out as the one to follow.

Though this, like many of Diogenes Laertius’ stories, may strike one as too propitious to be historically accurate, it preserves the way in which the primary tenets of Stoicism emerge out of Cynicism. The primacy of ethics, the sufficiency of virtue for happiness, the cultivation of indifference to external affairs, the definition of virtue as living in accord with nature, and the importance placed on askēsis, all mark the shared terrain between the Cynics and the Stoics. Indeed, when various Stoic thinkers list the handful of Stoic sages, Cynics, and especially Diogenes of Sinope, are typically among them. Epictetus in particular advocates the Cynic stance, but warns against taking up lightly something so difficult (see Discourses 3.22).

Within political philosophy, the Cynics can be seen as originators of anarchism. Since humans are both rational and able to be guided by nature, it follows that humans have little need for legal codes or political affiliations. Indeed, political associations at times require one to be vicious for the sake of the polis. Diogenes’ cosmopolitanism represents, then, a first suggestion that human affiliation ought to be to humanity rather than a single state.

The impact of Cynicism is also felt in Christian, Medieval, and Renaissance thought, though not without a good deal of ambivalence. Christian authors, for example, praise the Cynics for their self-discipline, independence, and mendicant lifestyle, but rebuke the bawdy aspects of Cynic shamelessness.

Finally, the mark of the Cynic is found throughout the texts of literature and philosophy. Menippean Satire has a clear debt, and Diogenes of Sinope in particular appears as a character in literary and philosophical contexts; Dante, for example, situates Diogenes with other virtuous but pagan philosophers in the first level of hell and Nietzsche is especially fond of both Diogenes and the Cynic attitude. One striking example occurs in section 125 of The Gay Science. Here Nietzsche alludes to the anecdote wherein Diogenes searches for a human being with a lit lamp in daylight (D.L. 6.41). In his own rendition, Nietzsche tells the story of the madman who entered the marketplace with a lit lamp on a bright morning seeking God. It is this same madman who pronounces that God is dead.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Billerbeck, Margarethe. Die Kyniker in der modernen Forschung. Amsterdam: B.R. Grüner, 1991.
  • Branham, Bracht and Marie-Odile Goulet-Cazé, eds. The Cynics: The Cynic Movement in Antiquity and Its Legacy. Berkeley: University of California Press, 1996.
  • Dudley, D. R. A History of Cynicism from Diogenes to the 6th Century A.D. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1937.
  • Epictetus. The Discourses as Reported by Arrian. Trans. W.A. Oldfather. Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1928.
  • Goulet-Cazé, Marie-Odile. L’Ascèse cynique: Un commentaire de Diogène Laërce VI 70-71, Deuxième édition. Paris: Libraire Philosophique J. VRIN, 2001.
  • Goulet-Cazé, Marie-Odile and Richard Goulet, eds.Le Cynisme ancien et ses prolongements. Paris: Presses Universitaires de France, 1993.
  • Hock, R.F. “Simon the Shoemaker as an Ideal Cynic,” in Greek, Roman and Byzantine Studies, 17 (1976).
  • Diogenes Laertius. Lives of Eminent Philosophers Vol. I-II. Trans. R.D. Hicks. Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1979.
  • Long, A.A. and David N. Sedley, eds. The Hellenistic Philosophers, Volume 1 andVolume 2. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1987.
  • Malherbe, Abraham J., ed. and trans. The Cynic Epistles. Missoula, Montana: Scholars Press, 1977.
  • Navia, Luis E. Diogenes of Sinope: The Man in the Tub. Westport, Connecticut: Greenwood Press, 1990.
  • Navia, Luis E. Classical Cynicism: A Critical Study. Westport, Connecticut: Greenwood Press, 1996.
  • Navia, Luis E. Antisthenes of Athens. Westport, Connecticut: Greenwood Press, 2001.
  • Paquet, Léonce. Les Cyniques grecs: fragments et témoignages. Ottawa: Presses de l’Universitaire d’Ottawa, 1988.
  • Sloterdijk, Peter. Critique of Cynical Reason. Trans. Michael Eldred. Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1987

Author Information

Julie Piering
University of Arkansas at Little Rock
U. S. A.

Analytic Philosophy

The school of analytic philosophy has dominated academic philosophy in various regions, most notably Great Britain and the United States, since the early twentieth century. It originated around the turn of the twentieth century as G. E. Moore and Bertrand Russell broke away from what was then the dominant school in the British universities, Absolute Idealism. Many would also include Gottlob Frege as a founder of analytic philosophy in the late 19th century, and this controversial issue is discussed in section 2c. When Moore and Russell articulated their alternative to Idealism, they used a linguistic idiom, frequently basing their arguments on the “meanings” of terms and propositions. Additionally, Russell believed that the grammar of natural language often is philosophically misleading, and that the way to dispel the illusion is to re-express propositions in the ideal formal language of symbolic logic, thereby revealing their true logical form. Because of this emphasis on language, analytic philosophy was widely, though perhaps mistakenly, taken to involve a turn toward language as the subject matter of philosophy, and it was taken to involve an accompanying methodological turn toward linguistic analysis. Thus, on the traditional view, analytic philosophy was born in this linguistic turn. The linguistic conception of philosophy was rightly seen as novel in the history of philosophy. For this reason analytic philosophy is reputed to have originated in a philosophical revolution on the grand scale—not merely in a revolt against British Idealism, but against traditional philosophy on the whole.

Analytic philosophy underwent several internal micro-revolutions that divide its history into five phases. The first phase runs approximately from 1900 to 1910. It is characterized by the quasi-Platonic form of realism initially endorsed by Moore and Russell as an alternative to Idealism. Their realism was expressed and defended in the idiom of “propositions” and “meanings,” so it was taken to involve a turn toward language. But its other significant feature is its turn away from the method of doing philosophy by proposing grand systems or broad syntheses and its turn