Category Archives: History of Philosophy

Francis Bacon (1561—1626)

bacon-francisSir Francis Bacon (later Lord Verulam and the Viscount St. Albans) was an English lawyer, statesman, essayist, historian, intellectual reformer, philosopher, and champion of modern science. Early in his career he claimed “all knowledge as his province” and afterwards dedicated himself to a wholesale revaluation and re-structuring of traditional learning. To take the place of the established tradition (a miscellany of Scholasticism, humanism, and natural magic), he proposed an entirely new system based on empirical and inductive principles and the active development of new arts and inventions, a system whose ultimate goal would be the production of practical knowledge for “the use and benefit of men” and the relief of the human condition.

At the same time that he was founding and promoting this new project for the advancement of learning, Bacon was also moving up the ladder of state service. His career aspirations had been largely disappointed under Elizabeth I, but with the ascension of James his political fortunes rose. Knighted in 1603, he was then steadily promoted to a series of offices, including Solicitor General (1607), Attorney General (1613), and eventually Lord Chancellor (1618). While serving as Chancellor, he was indicted on charges of bribery and forced to leave public office. He then retired to his estate where he devoted himself full time to his continuing literary, scientific, and philosophical work. He died in 1626, leaving behind a cultural legacy that, for better or worse, includes most of the foundation for the triumph of technology and for the modern world as we currently know it.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Political Career
  2. Thought and Writings
    1. Literary Works
    2. The New Atlantis
    3. Scientific and Philosophical Works
    4. The Great Instauration
    5. The Advancement of Learning
    6. The “Distempers” of Learning
    7. The Idea of Progress
    8. The Reclassification of Knowledge
    9. The New Organon
    10. The Idols
    11. Induction
  3. Reputation and Cultural Legacy
  4. References and Further Reading

1. Life and Political Career

Sir Francis Bacon (later Lord Verulam, the Viscount St. Albans, and Lord Chancellor of England) was born in London in 1561 to a prominent and well-connected family. His parents were Sir Nicholas Bacon, the Lord Keeper of the Seal, and Lady Anne Cooke, daughter of Sir Anthony Cooke, a knight and one-time tutor to the royal family. Lady Anne was a learned woman in her own right, having acquired Greek and Latin as well as Italian and French. She was a sister-in-law both to Sir Thomas Hoby, the esteemed English translator of Castiglione, and to Sir William Cecil (later Lord Burghley), Lord Treasurer, chief counselor to Elizabeth I, and from 1572-1598 the most powerful man in England.

Bacon was educated at home at the family estate at Gorhambury in Herfordshire. In 1573, at the age of just twelve, he entered Trinity College, Cambridge, where the stodgy Scholastic curriculum triggered his lifelong opposition to Aristotelianism (though not to the works of Aristotle himself).

In 1576 Bacon began reading law at Gray’s Inn. Yet only a year later he interrupted his studies in order to take a position in the diplomatic service in France as an assistant to the ambassador. In 1579, while he was still in France, his father died, leaving him (as the second son of a second marriage and the youngest of six heirs) virtually without support. With no position, no land, no income, and no immediate prospects, he returned to England and resumed the study of law.

Bacon completed his law degree in 1582, and in 1588 he was named lecturer in legal studies at Gray’s Inn. In the meantime, he was elected to Parliament in 1584 as a member for Melcombe in Dorsetshire. He would remain in Parliament as a representative for various constituencies for the next 36 years.

In 1593 his blunt criticism of a new tax levy resulted in an unfortunate setback to his career expectations, the Queen taking personal offense at his opposition. Any hopes he had of becoming Attorney General or Solicitor General during her reign were dashed, though Elizabeth eventually relented to the extent of appointing Bacon her Extraordinary Counsel in 1596.

It was around this time that Bacon entered the service of Robert Devereux, the Earl of Essex, a dashing courtier, soldier, plotter of intrigue, and sometime favorite of the Queen. No doubt Bacon viewed Essex as a rising star and a figure who could provide a much-needed boost to his own sagging career. Unfortunately, it was not long before Essex’s own fortunes plummeted following a series of military and political blunders culminating in a disastrous coup attempt. When the coup plot failed, Devereux was arrested, tried, and eventually executed, with Bacon, in his capacity as Queen’s Counsel, playing a vital role in the prosecution of the case.

In 1603, James I succeeded Elizabeth, and Bacon’s prospects for advancement dramatically improved. After being knighted by the king, he swiftly ascended the ladder of state and from 1604-1618 filled a succession of high-profile advisory positions:

  • 1604 – Appointed King’s Counsel.
  • 1607 – Named Solicitor General.
  • 1608 – Appointed Clerk of the Star Chamber.
  • 1613 – Appointed Attorney General.
  • 1616 – Made a member of the Privy Council.
  • 1617 – Appointed Lord Keeper of the Royal Seal (his father’s former office).
  • 1618 – Made Lord Chancellor.

As Lord Chancellor, Bacon wielded a degree of power and influence that he could only have imagined as a young lawyer seeking preferment. Yet it was at this point, while he stood at the very pinnacle of success, that he suffered his great Fall. In 1621 he was arrested and charged with bribery. After pleading guilty, he was heavily fined and sentenced to a prison term in the Tower of London. Although the fine was later waived and Bacon spent only four days in the Tower, he was never allowed to sit in Parliament or hold political office again.

The entire episode was a terrible disgrace for Bacon personally and a stigma that would cling to and injure his reputation for years to come. As various chroniclers of the case have pointed out, the accepting of gifts from suppliants in a law suit was a common practice in Bacon’s day, and it is also true that Bacon ended up judging against the two petitioners who had offered the fateful bribes. Yet the damage was done, and Bacon to his credit accepted the judgment against him without excuse. According to his own Essayes, or Counsels, he should have known and done better. (In this respect it is worth noting that during his forced retirement, Bacon revised and republished the Essayes, injecting an even greater degree of shrewdness into a collection already notable for its worldliness and keen political sense.) Macaulay in a lengthy essay declared Bacon a great intellect but (borrowing a phrase from Bacon’s own letters) a “most dishonest man,” and more than one writer has characterized him as cold, calculating, and arrogant. Yet whatever his flaws, even his enemies conceded that during his trial he accepted his punishment nobly, and moved on.

Bacon spent his remaining years working with renewed determination on his lifelong project: the reform of learning and the establishment of an intellectual community dedicated to the discovery of scientific knowledge for the “use and benefit of men.” The former Lord Chancellor died on 9 April, 1626, supposedly of a cold or pneumonia contracted while testing his theory of the preservative and insulating properties of snow.

2. Thought and Writings

In a way Bacon’s descent from political power was a fortunate fall, for it represented a liberation from the bondage of public life resulting in a remarkable final burst of literary and scientific activity. As Renaissance scholar and Bacon expert Brian Vickers has reminded us, Bacon’s earlier works, impressive as they are, were essentially products of his “spare time.” It was only during his last five years that he was able to concentrate exclusively on writing and produce, in addition to a handful of minor pieces:

  • Two substantial volumes of history and biography, The History of the Reign of King Henry the Seventh and The History of the Reign of King Henry the Eighth.
  • De Augmentis Scientiarum (an expanded Latin version of his earlier Advancement of Learning).
  • The final 1625 edition of his Essayes, or Counsels.
  • The remarkable Sylva Sylvarum, or A Natural History in Ten Centuries (a curious hodge-podge of scientific experiments, personal observations, speculations, ancient teachings, and analytical discussions on topics ranging from the causes of hiccups to explanations for the shortage of rain in Egypt). Artificially divided into ten “centuries” (that is, ten chapters, each consisting of one hundred items), the work was apparently intended to be included in Part Three of the Magna Instauratio.
  • His utopian science-fiction novel The New Atlantis, which was published in unfinished form a year after his death.
  • Various parts of his unfinished magnum opus Magna Instauratio (or Great Instauration), including a “Natural History of Winds” and a “Natural History of Life and Death.”

These late productions represented the capstone of a writing career that spanned more than four decades and encompassed virtually an entire curriculum of literary, scientific, and philosophical studies.

a. Literary Works

Despite the fanatical claims (and very un-Baconian credulity) of a few admirers, it is a virtual certainty that Bacon did not write the works traditionally attributed to William Shakespeare. Even so, the Lord Chancellor’s high place in the history of English literature as well as his influential role in the development of English prose style remain well-established and secure. Indeed even if Bacon had produced nothing else but his masterful Essayes (first published in 1597 and then revised and expanded in 1612 and 1625), he would still rate among the top echelon of 17th-century English authors. And so when we take into account his other writings, e.g., his histories, letters, and especially his major philosophical and scientific works, we must surely place him in the first rank of English literature’s great men of letters and among its finest masters (alongside names like Johnson, Mill, Carlyle, and Ruskin) of non-fiction prose.

Bacon’s style, though elegant, is by no means as simple as it seems or as it is often described. In fact it is actually a fairly complex affair that achieves its air of ease and clarity more through its balanced cadences, natural metaphors, and carefully arranged symmetries than through the use of plain words, commonplace ideas, and straightforward syntax. (In this connection it is noteworthy that in the revised versions of the essays Bacon seems to have deliberately disrupted many of his earlier balanced effects to produce a style that is actually more jagged and, in effect, more challenging to the casual reader.)

Furthermore, just as Bacon’s personal style and living habits were prone to extravagance and never particularly austere, so in his writing he was never quite able to resist the occasional grand word, magniloquent phrase, or orotund effect. (As Dr. Johnson observed, “A dictionary of the English language might be compiled from Bacon’s works alone.”) Bishop Sprat in his 1667 History of the Royal Society honored Bacon and praised the society membership for supposedly eschewing fine words and fancy metaphors and adhering instead to a natural lucidity and “mathematical plainness.” To write in such a way, Sprat suggested, was to follow true, scientific, Baconian principles. And while Bacon himself often expressed similar sentiments (praising blunt expression while condemning the seductions of figurative language), a reader would be hard pressed to find many examples of such spare technique in Bacon’s own writings. Of Bacon’s contemporary readers, at least one took exception to the view that his writing represented a perfect model of plain language and transparent meaning. After perusing the New Organon, King James (to whom Bacon had proudly dedicated the volume) reportedly pronounced the work “like the peace of God, which passeth all understanding.”

b. The New Atlantis

As a work of narrative fiction, Bacon’s novel New Atlantis may be classified as a literary rather than a scientific (or philosophical) work, though it effectively belongs to both categories. According to Bacon’s amanuensis and first biographer William Rawley, the novel represents the first part (showing the design of a great college or institute devoted to the interpretation of nature) of what was to have been a longer and more detailed project (depicting the entire legal structure and political organization of an ideal commonwealth). The work thus stands in the great tradition of the utopian-philosophical novel that stretches from Plato and More to Huxley and Skinner.

The thin plot or fable is little more than a fictional shell to contain the real meat of Bacon’s story: the elaborate description of Salomon’s House (also known as the College of the Six Days Works), a centrally organized research facility where specially trained teams of investigators collect data, conduct experiments, and (most importantly from Bacon’s point of view) apply the knowledge they gain to produce “things of use and practice for man’s life.” These new arts and inventions they eventually share with the outside world.

In terms of its sci-fi adventure elements, the New Atlantis is about as exciting as a government or university re-organization plan. But in terms of its historical impact, the novel has proven to be nothing less than revolutionary, having served not only as an effective inspiration and model for the British Royal Society, but also as an early blueprint and prophecy of the modern research center and international scientific community.

c. Scientific and Philosophical Works

It is never easy to summarize the thought of a prolific and wide-ranging philosopher. Yet Bacon somewhat simplifies the task by his own helpful habits of systematic classification and catchy mnemonic labeling. (Thus, for example, there are three “distempers” – or diseases – of learning,” eleven errors or “peccant humours,” four “Idols,” three primary mental faculties and categories of knowledge, etc.) In effect, by following Bacon’s own methods it is possible to produce a convenient outline or overview of his main scientific and philosophical ideas.

d. The Great Instauration

As early as 1592, in a famous letter to his uncle, Lord Burghley, Bacon declared “all knowledge” to be his province and vowed his personal commitment to a plan for the full-scale rehabilitation and reorganization of learning. In effect, he dedicated himself to a long-term project of intellectual reform, and the balance of his career can be viewed as a continuing effort to make good on that pledge. In 1620, while he was still at the peak of his political success, he published the preliminary description and plan for an enormous work that would fully answer to his earlier declared ambitions. The work, dedicated to James, was to be called Magna Instauratio (that is, the “grand edifice” or Great Instauration), and it would represent a kind of summa or culmination of all Bacon’s thought on subjects ranging from logic and epistemology to practical science (or what in Bacon’s day was called “natural philosophy,” the word science being then but a general synonym for “wisdom” or “learning”).

Like several of Bacon’s projects, the Instauratio in its contemplated form was never finished. Of the intended six parts, only the first two were completed, while the other portions were only partly finished or barely begun. Consequently, the work as we have it is less like the vast but well-sculpted monument that Bacon envisioned than a kind of philosophical miscellany or grab-bag. Part I of the project, De Dignitate et Augmentis Scientiarum (“Nine Books of the Dignity and Advancement of Learning”), was published in 1623. It is basically an enlarged version of the earlier Proficience and Advancement of Learning, which Bacon had presented to James in 1605. Part II, the Novum Organum (or “New Organon”) provides the author’s detailed explanation and demonstration of the correct procedure for interpreting nature. It first appeared in 1620. Together these two works present the essential elements of Bacon’s philosophy, including most of the major ideas and principles that we have come to associate with the terms “Baconian” and “Baconianism.”

e. The Advancement of Learning

Relatively early in his career Bacon judged that, owing mainly to an undue reverence for the past (as well as to an excessive absorption in cultural vanities and frivolities), the intellectual life of Europe had reached a kind of impasse or standstill. Yet he believed there was a way beyond this stagnation if persons of learning, armed with new methods and insights, would simply open their eyes and minds to the world around them. This at any rate was the basic argument of his seminal 1605 treatise The Proficience and Advancement of Learning, arguably the first important philosophical work to be published in English.

It is in this work that Bacon sketched out the main themes and ideas that he continued to refine and develop throughout his career, beginning with the notion that there are clear obstacles to or diseases of learning that must be avoided or purged before further progress is possible.

f. The “Distempers” of Learning

“There be therefore chiefly three vanities in studies, whereby learning hath been most traduced.” Thus Bacon, in the first book of the Advancement. He goes on to refer to these vanities as the three “distempers” of learning and identifies them (in his characteristically memorable fashion) as “fantastical learning,” “contentious learning,” and “delicate learning” (alternatively identified as “vain imaginations,” “vain altercations,” and “vain affectations”).

By fantastical learning (“vain imaginations”) Bacon had in mind what we would today call pseudo-science: i.e., a collection of ideas that lack any real or substantial foundation, that are professed mainly by occultists and charlatans, that are carefully shielded from outside criticism, and that are offered largely to an audience of credulous true believers. In Bacon’s day such “imaginative science” was familiar in the form of astrology, natural magic, and alchemy.

By contentious learning (“vain altercations”) Bacon was referring mainly to Aristotelian philosophy and theology and especially to the Scholastic tradition of logical hair-splitting and metaphysical quibbling. But the phrase applies to any intellectual endeavor in which the principal aim is not new knowledge or deeper understanding but endless debate cherished for its own sake.

Delicate learning (“vain affectations”) was Bacon’s label for the new humanism insofar as (in his view) it seemed concerned not with the actual recovery of ancient texts or the retrieval of past knowledge but merely with the revival of Ciceronian rhetorical embellishments and the reproduction of classical prose style. Such preoccupation with “words more than matter,” with “choiceness of phrase” and the “sweet falling of clauses” – in short, with style over substance – seemed to Bacon (a careful stylist in his own right) the most seductive and decadent literary vice of his age.

Here we may note that from Bacon’s point of view the “distempers” of learning share two main faults:

  1. Prodigal ingenuity – i.e., each distemper represents a lavish and regrettable waste of talent, as inventive minds that might be employed in more productive pursuits exhaust their energy on trivial or puerile enterprises instead.
  2. Sterile results – i.e., instead of contributing to the discovery of new knowledge (and thus to a practical “advancement of learning” and eventually to a better life for all), the distempers of learning are essentially exercises in personal vainglory that aim at little more than idle theorizing or the preservation of older forms of knowledge.

In short, in Bacon’s view the distempers impede genuine intellectual progress by beguiling talented thinkers into fruitless, illusory, or purely self-serving ventures. What is needed – and this is a theme reiterated in all his later writings on learning and human progress – is a program to re-channel that same creative energy into socially useful new discoveries.

g. The Idea of Progress

Though it is hard to pinpoint the birth of an idea, for all intents and purposes the modern idea of technological “progress” (in the sense of a steady, cumulative, historical advance in applied scientific knowledge) began with Bacon’s The Advancement of Learning and became fully articulated in his later works.

Knowledge is power, and when embodied in the form of new technical inventions and mechanical discoveries it is the force that drives history – this was Bacon’s key insight. In many respects this idea was his single greatest invention, and it is all the more remarkable for its having been conceived and promoted at a time when most English and European intellectuals were either reverencing the literary and philosophical achievements of the past or deploring the numerous signs of modern degradation and decline. Indeed, while Bacon was preaching progress and declaring a brave new dawn of scientific advance, many of his colleagues were persuaded that the world was at best creaking along towards a state of senile immobility and eventual darkness. “Our age is iron, and rusty too,” wrote John Donne, contemplating the signs of universal decay in a poem published six years after Bacon’s Advancement.

That history might in fact be progressive, i.e., an onward and upward ascent – and not, as Aristotle had taught, merely cyclical or, as cultural pessimists from Hesiod to Spengler have supposed, a descending or retrograde movement, became for Bacon an article of secular faith which he propounded with evangelical force and a sense of mission. In the Advancement, the idea is offered tentatively, as a kind of hopeful hypothesis. But in later works such as the New Organon, it becomes almost a promised destiny: Enlightenment and a better world, Bacon insists, lie within our power; they require only the cooperation of learned citizens and the active development of the arts and sciences.

h. The Reclassification of Knowledge

In Book II of De Dignitate (his expanded version of the Advancement) Bacon outlines his scheme for a new division of human knowledge into three primary categories: History, Poesy, and Philosophy (which he associates respectively with the three fundamental “faculties” of mind – memory, imagination, and reason). Although the exact motive behind this reclassification remains unclear, one of its main consequences seems unmistakable: it effectively promotes philosophy – and especially Baconian science – above the other two branches of knowledge, in essence defining history as the mere accumulation of brute facts, while reducing art and imaginative literature to the even more marginal status of “feigned history.”

Evidently Bacon believed that in order for a genuine advancement of learning to occur, the prestige of philosophy (and particularly natural philosophy) had to be elevated, while that of history and literature (in a word, humanism) needed to be reduced. Bacon’s scheme effectively accomplishes this by making history (the domain of fact, i.e., of everything that has happened) a virtual sub-species of philosophy (the domain of realistic possibility, i.e., of everything that can theoretically or actually occur). Meanwhile, poesy (the domain of everything that is imaginable or conceivable) is set off to the side as a mere illustrative vehicle. In essence, it becomes simply a means of recreating actual scenes or events from the past (as in history plays or heroic poetry) or of allegorizing or dramatizing new ideas or future possibilities (as in Bacon’s own interesting example of “parabolic poesy,” the New Atlantis.)

i. The New Organon

To the second part of his Great Instauration Bacon gave the title New Organon (or “True Directions concerning the Interpretation of Nature”). The Greek word organon means “instrument” or “tool,” and Bacon clearly felt he was supplying a new instrument for guiding and correcting the mind in its quest for a true understanding of nature. The title also glances at Aristotle’s Organon (a collection that includes his Categories and his Prior and Posterior Analytics) and thus suggests a “new instrument” destined to transcend or replace the older, no longer serviceable one. (This notion of surpassing ancient authority is aptly illustrated on the frontispiece of the 1620 volume containing the New Organon by a ship boldly sailing beyond the mythical pillars of Hercules, which supposedly marked the end of the known world.)

The New Organon is presented not in the form of a treatise or methodical demonstration but as a series of aphorisms, a technique that Bacon came to favor as less legislative and dogmatic and more in the true spirit of scientific experiment and critical inquiry. Combined with his gift for illustrative metaphor and symbol, the aphoristic style makes the New Organon in many places the most readable and literary of all Bacon’s scientific and philosophical works.

j. The Idols

In Book I of the New Organon (Aphorisms 39-68), Bacon introduces his famous doctrine of the “idols.” These are characteristic errors, natural tendencies, or defects that beset the mind and prevent it from achieving a full and accurate understanding of nature. Bacon points out that recognizing and counteracting the idols is as important to the study of nature as the recognition and refutation of bad arguments is to logic. Incidentally, he uses the word “idol” – from the Greek eidolon (“image” or “phantom”) – not in the sense of a false god or heathen deity but rather in the sense employed in Epicurean physics. Thus a Baconian idol is a potential deception or source of misunderstanding, especially one that clouds or confuses our knowledge of external reality.

Bacon identifies four different classes of idol. Each arises from a different source, and each presents its own special hazards and difficulties.

1. The Idols of the Tribe.

These are the natural weaknesses and tendencies common to human nature. Because they are innate, they cannot be completely eliminated, but only recognized and compensated for. Some of Bacon’s examples are:

  • Our senses – which are inherently dull and easily deceivable. (Which is why Bacon prescribes instruments and strict investigative methods to correct them.)
  • Our tendency to discern (or even impose) more order in phenomena than is actually there. As Bacon points out, we are apt to find similitude where there is actually singularity, regularity where there is actually randomness, etc.
  • Our tendency towards “wishful thinking.” According to Bacon, we have a natural inclination to accept, believe, and even prove what we would prefer to be true.
  • Our tendency to rush to conclusions and make premature judgments (instead of gradually and painstakingly accumulating evidence).

2. The Idols of the Cave.

Unlike the idols of the tribe, which are common to all human beings, those of the cave vary from individual to individual. They arise, that is to say, not from nature but from culture and thus reflect the peculiar distortions, prejudices, and beliefs that we are all subject to owing to our different family backgrounds, childhood experiences, education, training, gender, religion, social class, etc. Examples include:

  • Special allegiance to a particular discipline or theory.
  • High esteem for a few select authorities.
  • A “cookie-cutter” mentality – that is, a tendency to reduce or confine phenomena within the terms of our own narrow training or discipline.

3. The Idols of the Market Place.

These are hindrances to clear thinking that arise, Bacon says, from the “intercourse and association of men with each other.” The main culprit here is language, though not just common speech, but also (and perhaps particularly) the special discourses, vocabularies, and jargons of various academic communities and disciplines. He points out that “the idols imposed by words on the understanding are of two kinds”: “they are either names of things that do not exist” (e.g., the crystalline spheres of Aristotelian cosmology) or faulty, vague, or misleading names for things that do exist (according to Bacon, abstract qualities and value terms – e.g., “moist,” “useful,” etc. – can be a particular source of confusion).

4. The Idols of the Theatre.

Like the idols of the cave, those of the theatre are culturally acquired rather than innate. And although the metaphor of a theatre suggests an artificial imitation of truth, as in drama or fiction, Bacon makes it clear that these idols derive mainly from grand schemes or systems of philosophy – and especially from three particular types of philosophy:

  • Sophistical Philosophy – that is, philosophical systems based only on a few casually observed instances (or on no experimental evidence at all) and thus constructed mainly out of abstract argument and speculation. Bacon cites Scholasticism as a conspicuous example.
  • Empirical Philosophy – that is, a philosophical system ultimately based on a single key insight (or on a very narrow base of research), which is then erected into a model or paradigm to explain phenomena of all kinds. Bacon cites the example of William Gilbert, whose experiments with the lodestone persuaded him that magnetism operated as the hidden force behind virtually all earthly phenomena.
  • Superstitious Philosophy – this is Bacon’s phrase for any system of thought that mixes theology and philosophy. He cites Pythagoras and Plato as guilty of this practice, but also points his finger at pious contemporary efforts, similar to those of Creationists today, to found systems of natural philosophy on Genesis or the book of Job.

k. Induction

At the beginning of the Magna Instauratio and in Book II of the New Organon, Bacon introduces his system of “true and perfect Induction,” which he proposes as the essential foundation of scientific method and a necessary tool for the proper interpretation of nature. (This system was to have been more fully explained and demonstrated in Part IV of the Instauratio in a section titled “The Ladder of the Intellect,” but unfortunately the work never got beyond an introduction.)

According to Bacon, his system differs not only from the deductive logic and mania for syllogisms of the Schoolmen, but also from the classic induction of Aristotle and other logicians. As Bacon explains it, classic induction proceeds “at once from . . . sense and particulars up to the most general propositions” and then works backward (via deduction) to arrive at intermediate propositions. Thus, for example, from a few observations one might conclude (via induction) that “all new cars are shiny.” One would then be entitled to proceed backward from this general axiom to deduce such middle-level axioms as “all new Lexuses are shiny,” “all new Jeeps are shiny,” etc. – axioms that presumably would not need to be verified empirically since their truth would be logically guaranteed as long as the original generalization (“all new cars are shiny”) is true.

As Bacon rightly points out, one problem with this procedure is that if the general axioms prove false, all the intermediate axioms may be false as well. All it takes is one contradictory instance (in this case one new car with a dull finish) and “the whole edifice tumbles.” For this reason Bacon prescribes a different path. His method is to proceed “regularly and gradually from one axiom to another, so that the most general are not reached till the last.” In other words, each axiom – i.e., each step up “the ladder of intellect” – is thoroughly tested by observation and experimentation before the next step is taken. In effect, each confirmed axiom becomes a foothold to a higher truth, with the most general axioms representing the last stage of the process.

Thus, in the example described, the Baconian investigator would be obliged to examine a full inventory of new Chevrolets, Lexuses, Jeeps, etc., before reaching any conclusions about new cars in general. And while Bacon admits that such a method can be laborious, he argues that it eventually produces a stable edifice of knowledge instead of a rickety structure that collapses with the appearance of a single disconfirming instance. (Indeed, according to Bacon, when one follows his inductive procedure, a negative instance actually becomes something to be welcomed rather than feared. For instead of threatening an entire assembly, the discovery of a false generalization actually saves the investigator the trouble of having to proceed further in a particular direction or line of inquiry. Meanwhile the structure of truth that he has already built remains intact.)

Is Bacon’s system, then, a sound and reliable procedure, a strong ladder leading from carefully observed particulars to true and “inevitable” conclusions? Although he himself firmly believed in the utility and overall superiority of his method, many of his commentators and critics have had doubts. For one thing, it is not clear that the Baconian procedure, taken by itself, leads conclusively to any general propositions, much less to scientific principles or theoretical statements that we can accept as universally true. For at what point is the Baconian investigator willing to make the leap from observed particulars to abstract generalizations? After a dozen instances? A thousand? The fact is, Bacon’s method provides nothing to guide the investigator in this determination other than sheer instinct or professional judgment, and thus the tendency is for the investigation of particulars – the steady observation and collection of data – to go on continuously, and in effect endlessly.

One can thus easily imagine a scenario in which the piling up of instances becomes not just the initial stage in a process, but the very essence of the process itself; in effect, a zealous foraging after facts (in the New Organon Bacon famously compares the ideal Baconian researcher to a busy bee) becomes not only a means to knowledge, but an activity vigorously pursued for its own sake. Every scientist and academic person knows how tempting it is to put off the hard work of imaginative thinking in order to continue doing some form of rote research. Every investigator knows how easy it is to become wrapped up in data – with the unhappy result that one’s intended ascent up the Baconian ladder gets stuck in mundane matters of fact and never quite gets off the ground.

It was no doubt considerations like these that prompted the English physician (and neo-Aristotelian) William Harvey, of circulation-of-the-blood fame, to quip that Bacon wrote of natural philosophy “like a Lord Chancellor” – indeed like a politician or legislator rather than a practitioner. The assessment is just to the extent that Bacon in the New Organon does indeed prescribe a new and extremely rigid procedure for the investigation of nature rather than describe the more or less instinctive and improvisational – and by no means exclusively empirical – method that Kepler, Galileo, Harvey himself, and other working scientists were actually employing. In fact, other than Tycho Brahe, the Danish astronomer who, overseeing a team of assistants, faithfully observed and then painstakingly recorded entire volumes of astronomical data in tidy, systematically arranged tables, it is doubtful that there is another major figure in the history of science who can be legitimately termed an authentic, true-blooded Baconian. (Darwin, it is true, claimed that The Origin of Species was based on “Baconian principles.” However, it is one thing to collect instances in order to compare species and show a relationship among them; it is quite another to theorize a mechanism, namely evolution by mutation and natural selection, that elegantly and powerfully explains their entire history and variety.)

Science, that is to say, does not, and has probably never advanced according to the strict, gradual, ever-plodding method of Baconian observation and induction. It proceeds instead by unpredictable – and often intuitive and even (though Bacon would cringe at the word) imaginative – leaps and bounds. Kepler used Tycho’s scrupulously gathered data to support his own heart-felt and even occult belief that the movements of celestial bodies are regular and symmetrical, composing a true harmony of the spheres. Galileo tossed unequal weights from the Leaning Tower as a mere public demonstration of the fact (contrary to Aristotle) that they would fall at the same rate. He had long before satisfied himself that this would happen via the very un-Bacon-like method of mathematical reasoning and deductive thought-experiment. Harvey, by a similar process of quantitative analysis and deductive logic, knew that the blood must circulate, and it was only to provide proof of this fact that he set himself the secondary task of amassing empirical evidence and establishing the actual method by which it did so.

One could enumerate – in true Baconian fashion – a host of further instances. But the point is already made: advances in scientific knowledge have not been achieved for the most part via Baconian induction (which amounts to a kind of systematic and exhaustive survey of nature supposedly leading to ultimate insights) but rather by shrewd hints and guesses – in a word by hypotheses – that are then either corroborated or (in Karl Popper’s important term) falsified by subsequent research.

In summary, then, it can be said that Bacon underestimated the role of imagination and hypothesis (and overestimated the value of minute observation and bee-like data collection) in the production of new scientific knowledge. And in this respect it is true that he wrote of science like a Lord Chancellor, regally proclaiming the benefits of his own new and supposedly foolproof technique instead of recognizing and adapting procedures that had already been tested and approved. On the other hand, it must be added that Bacon did not present himself (or his method) as the final authority on the investigation of nature or, for that matter, on any other topic or issue relating to the advance of knowledge. By his own admission, he was but the Buccinator, or “trumpeter,” of such a revolutionary advance – not the founder or builder of a vast new system, but only the herald or announcing messenger of a new world to come.

3. Reputation and Cultural Legacy

If anyone deserves the title “universal genius” or “Renaissance man” (accolades traditionally reserved for those who make significant, original contributions to more than one professional discipline or area of learning), Bacon clearly merits the designation. Like Leonardo and Goethe, he produced important work in both the arts and sciences. Like Cicero, Marcus Aurelius, Benjamin Franklin, and Thomas Jefferson, he combined wide and ample intellectual and literary interests (from practical rhetoric and the study of nature to moral philosophy and educational reform) with a substantial political career. Like his near contemporary Machiavelli, he excelled in a variety of literary genres – from learned treatises to light entertainments – though, also like the great Florentine writer, he thought of himself mainly as a political statesman and practical visionary: a man whose primary goal was less to obtain literary laurels for himself than to mold the agendas and guide the policy decisions of powerful nobles and heads of state.

In our own era Bacon would be acclaimed as a “public intellectual,” though his personal record of service and authorship would certainly dwarf the achievements of most academic and political leaders today. Like nearly all public figures, he was controversial. His chaplain and first biographer William Rawley declared him “the glory of his age and nation” and portrayed him as an angel of enlightenment and social vision. His admirers in the Royal Society (an organization that traced its own inspiration and lineage to the Lord Chancellor’s writings) viewed him as nothing less than the daring originator of a new intellectual era. The poet Abraham Cowley called him a “Moses” and portrayed him as an exalted leader who virtually all by himself had set learning on a bold, firm, and entirely new path:

Bacon at last, a mighty Man, arose

Whom a wise King and Nature chose

Lord Chancellour of both their Lawes. . . .

The barren Wilderness he past,

Did on the very Border stand

Of the great promis’d Land,

And from the Mountains Top of his Exalted Wit,

Saw it himself and shew’d us it. . . .

Similarly adulatory if more prosaic assessments were offered by learned contemporaries or near contemporaries from Descartes and Gassendi to Robert Hooke and Robert Boyle. Leibniz was particularly generous and observed that, compared to Bacon’s philosophical range and lofty vision, even a great genius like Descartes “creeps on the ground.” On the other hand, Spinoza, another close contemporary, dismissed Bacon’s work (especially his inductive theories) completely and in effect denied that the supposedly grand philosophical revolution decreed by Bacon, and welcomed by his partisans, had ever occurred.

The response of the later Enlightenment was similarly divided, with a majority of thinkers lavishly praising Bacon while a dissenting minority castigated or even ridiculed him. The French encyclopedists Jean d’Alembert and Denis Diderot sounded the keynote of this 18th-century re-assessment, essentially hailing Bacon as a founding father of the modern era and emblazoning his name on the front page of the Encyclopedia. In a similar gesture, Kant dedicated his Critique of Pure Reason to Bacon and likewise saluted him as an early architect of modernity. Hegel, on the other hand, took a dimmer view. In his “Lectures on the History of Philosophy” he congratulated Bacon on his worldly sophistication and shrewdness of mind, but ultimately judged him to be a person of depraved character and a mere “coiner of mottoes.” In his view, the Lord Chancellor was a decidedly low-minded (read typically English and utilitarian) philosopher whose instruction was fit mainly for “civil servants and shopkeepers.”

Probably the fullest and most perceptive Enlightenment account of Bacon’s achievement and place in history was Voltaire’s laudatory essay in his Letters on the English. After referring to Bacon as the father of experimental philosophy, he went on to assess his literary merits, judging him to be an elegant, instructive, and witty writer, though too much given to “fustian.”

Bacon’s reputation and legacy remain controversial even today. While no historian of science or philosophy doubts his immense importance both as a proselytizer on behalf of the empirical method and as an advocate of sweeping intellectual reform, opinion varies widely as to the actual social value and moral significance of the ideas that he represented and effectively bequeathed to us. The issue basically comes down to one’s estimate of or sympathy for the entire Enlightenment/Utilitarian project. Those who for the most part share Bacon’s view that nature exists mainly for human use and benefit, and who furthermore endorse his opinion that scientific inquiry should aim first and foremost at the amelioration of the human condition and the “relief of man’s estate,” generally applaud him as a great social visionary. On the other hand, those who view nature as an entity in its own right, a higher-order estate of which the human community is only a part, tend to perceive him as a kind of arch-villain – the evil originator of the idea of science as the instrument of global imperialism and technological conquest.

On the one side, then, we have figures like the anthropologist and science writer Loren Eiseley, who portrays Bacon (whom he calls “the man who saw through time”) as a kind of Promethean culture hero. He praises Bacon as the great inventor of the idea of science as both a communal enterprise and a practical discipline in the service of humanity. On the other side, we have writers, from Theodor Adorno, Max Horkheimer, and Lewis Mumford to, more recently, Jeremy Rifkin and eco-feminist Carolyn Merchant, who have represented him as one of the main culprits behind what they perceive as western science’s continuing legacy of alienation, exploitation, and ecological oppression.

Clearly somewhere in between this ardent Baconolotry on the one hand and strident demonization of Bacon on the other lies the real Lord Chancellor: a Colossus with feet of clay. He was by no means a great system-builder (indeed his Magna Instauratio turned out to be less of a “grand edifice” than a magnificent heap) but rather, as he more modestly portrayed himself, a great spokesman for the reform of learning and a champion of modern science. In the end we can say that he was one of the giant figures of intellectual history – and as brilliant, and flawed, a philosopher as he was a statesman.

4. References and Further Reading

Note: The standard edition of Bacon’s Works and Letters and Life is still that of James Spedding, et. al., (14 volumes, London, 1857- 1874), also available in a facsimile reprint (Stuttgart, 1989).

  • Adorno, Theodor and Max Horkheimer. The Dialectic of Enlightenment. 1944.
  • Anderson, F. H. Francis Bacon: His Career and His Thought. Los Angeles: University of Southern California Press, 1962.
  • Bury, J.B. The Idea of Progress. London: MacMillan, 1920.
  • Eiseley, Loren. The Man Who Saw Through Time. New York: Scribners, 1973.
  • Fish, Stanley E. “The Experience of Bacon’s Essays.” In Self-Consuming Artifacts. Berkeley, CA: University of California Press, 1972.
  • Gaukroger, Stephen. Francis Bacon and the Transformation of Early-modern Philosophy. Cambridge, U.K. ; New York : Cambridge University Press, 2001.
  • Merchant, Carolyn. The Death of Nature: Women, Ecology, and the Scientific Revolution. San Francisco: Harper and Row, 1980.
  • Mumford, Lewis. Technics and Civilization. 1934.
  • Lampert, Laurence. Nietzsche and Modern Times : A Study of Bacon, Descartes, and Nietzsche. New Haven, Conn.: Yale University Press, 1993.
  • Rifkin, Jeremy. Biosphere Politics. New York: Crown, 1991.
  • Rossi, Paolo. Francis Bacon: from Magic to Science. Trans. Sacha Rabinovitch. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1968.
  • Vickers, Brian. Francis Bacon. Harlow, UK: Longman Group, 1978.
  • Vickers, Brian, Ed. Francis Bacon. New York : Oxford University Press, 1996.
  • Whitney, Charles. Francis Bacon and Modernity. New Haven, CN: Yale University Press, 1986.

Author Information

David Simpson
DePaul University
U. S. A.


The Cyrenaics are one of the minor Socratic schools. The school was founded by Aristippus, a follower of Socrates. The Cyrenaics are notable mainly for their empiricist and skeptical epistemology and their sensualist hedonism. They believe that we can have certain knowledge of our immediate states of perceptual awareness, e.g., that I am seeing white now. However, we cannot go beyond these experiences to gain any knowledge about the objects themselves that cause these experiences or about the external world in general. Some of their arguments prefigure the positions of later Greek skeptics, and their distinction between the incorrigibility of immediate perceptual states versus the uncertainty of belief about the external world became key to the epistemological problems confronting philosophers of the 'modern' period, such as Descartes and Hume. In ethics, they advocate pleasure as the highest good. Furthermore, bodily pleasures are preferable to mental pleasures, and we should pursue whatever will bring us pleasure now, rather than deferring present pleasures for the sake of achieving better long-term consequences. In all these respects, their iconoclastic and 'crude' hedonism stands well outside the mainstream of Greek ethical thought, and their theories were often contrasted with Epicurus' more moderate hedonism.

Table of Contents

  1. History
  2. Epistemology
    1. Experiences and Their Causes
      1. The Relativity of Perception
      2. The Privacy of Experience and the Problem of Other Minds
    2. The Cyrenaics, Relativism, and Skepticism
      1. The Cyrenaics and Protagoras
      2. The Cyrenaics and Pyrrhonian Skeptics
  3. Ethics
    1. The Value and Nature of Pleasure
    2. Pleasure, Happiness, and Prudence
      1. Personal Identity and Momentary Pleasure
      2. The Self-Defeating Nature of Future-Concern
      3. Present Preferences and Future-Concern
    3. Custom, Morality, and Friendship
    4. Later Cyrenaics
      1. Hegesias
      2. Anniceris
      3. Theodorus
  4. Ancient Sources
  5. References and Further Reading

1. History

The Cyrenaic school was founded by Aristippus (c. 435-356 B.C.), a follower of Socrates and a rough contemporary of Plato. The name 'Cyrenaic' comes from Cyrene, Aristippus' home town, a Greek colony in Northern Africa. Aristippus taught philosophy to his daughter Arete, who in turn taught philosophy to her son Aristippus. Aristippus the younger formulated many of the theories of the Cyrenaic school, so that some scholars count him as being more properly the founder of the school, with Aristippus the Elder being merely the school's figurehead. However, disentangling the exact contributions of the two to the Cyrenaic philosophy is difficult. Later Cyrenaics, notably Hegesias, Anniceris, and Theodorus, who were rough contemporaries of Epicurus, modified the Cyrenaic ethical doctrines in different directions, and the school died out shortly afterwards, around the middle of the 3rd century B.C. However, it did have some influence on later philosophers. Epicurus most likely developed some of the distinctive features of his ascetic hedonism in order to avoid what he saw as the unpalatable consequences of Cyrenaic hedonism, and many of the Cyrenaic arguments against the possibility of gaining knowledge of the external world were appropriated by later academic and Pyrrhonian skeptics.

2. Epistemology

The Cyrenaics are empiricists and skeptics. As empiricists, they believe that all that we have access to as a potential source of knowledge are our own experiences. These experiences are private to each of us. We can have incorrigible knowledge of our experiences (that is, it impossible to be mistaken about what we are currently experiencing), but not of the objects that cause us to have these experiences. This results in their skepticism---their conviction that we cannot have knowledge of the external world.

a. Experiences and Their Causes

The Cyrenaics affirm that pathê--affections, or experiences--are the criterion of knowledge. They distinguish sharply between the experiences that one has--e.g., that I am now seeing gray--and the objects that cause one to have these experiences--e.g., the computer screen.

We can have infallible knowledge of our own experiences, since we have immediate access to them, but we do not have access to objects and qualities in the external world. As the Cyrenaics put it, "The experience which takes place in us reveals to us nothing more than itself." The Cyrenaics reinforce this point by saying that, strictly speaking, we should not say, "I am seeing something yellow," for instance, but "I am being yellowed," or "I am being moved by something yellowly," since the latter statements make it clear that we are reporting only our immediate perceptual state. (In this respect, the Cyrenaics bear a striking resemblance to some modern epistemologists, who resort to locutions like "I am being appeared to redly now" as describing accurately what is immediately given to us in experience.)

The Cyrenaics have two main arguments for why it is impossible to make inferences about the qualities of objects in the external world on the basis of our experiences:

i. The Relativity of Perception

The Cyrenaics note that the same object can cause different perceivers to experience different sensible qualities, depending on the bodily condition of the perceivers. For instance, honey will taste sweet to most people, but bitter to somebody with an illness, and the same wall that appears white to one person will look yellow to somebody with jaundice. And if a person presses his eye, he sees double.

From the fact that the wall appears white to me and yellow to you, the Cyrenaics think we should infer that we cannot know which quality the wall itself has on the basis of our experience of it, presumably because we have no criterion outside of our experiences to use to adjudicate which one (if either) of our experiences is correct. Such arguments from the relativity of perception are common in ancient Greek philosophy, and other thinkers draw different conclusions; for example, Protagoras says we should conclude that the wall is both white (for me) and yellow (for you), while Democritus thinks that we should conclude that it is neither white nor yellow.

ii. The Privacy of Experience and the Problem of Other Minds

Even if all people were to agree on the perceptual quality that some object has--for instance, that a wall appears white--the Cyrenaics still think that we could not confidently say that we are having the same experience. This is because each of us has access only to our own experiences, not to those of other people, and so the mere fact that each of us calls the wall 'white' does not show us that we are all having the same experience that I am having when I use the word 'white.'

This argument of the Cyrenaics anticipates the problem of other minds---that is, how can I know that other people have a mind like I do, since I only observe their behavior (if even that), not the mental states that might or might not cause that behavior?

b. The Cyrenaics, Relativism, and Skepticism

The Cyrenaic position bears some striking resemblance to the relativistic epistemology of the sophist Protagoras, as depicted in Plato's dialogue Theaetetus, and to the skeptical epistemology of the Pyrrhonists. Because of this, the Cyrenaics' epistemology is sometimes wrongly assimilated that of Protagoras or the Pyrrhonists. However, the Cyrenaics' subjectivism is quite different from those positions, and explaining their differences will help bring out what is distinctive about the Cyrenaics.

i. The Cyrenaics and Protagoras

The Cyrenaics and Protagoras do have similar starting-points. Protagoras also says that knowledge comes from perception. He uses basically the same arguments from relativity that the Cyrenaics use, and on their basis asserts that each of us infallibly has knowledge of how things appear to us. So, if I feel that the wind is hot, and judge that "the wind is hot," I am judging truly (for me) how the wind is. And if the wind feels not-hot to you, and you judge that "the wind is not hot," you are also judging truly (for you) how the wind is. These apparently contradictory statements can both betrue, since each of us is judging only about how things appear to us.

However, there are important differences between Protagoras' relativism and the Cyrenaics' subjectivism. The Cyrenaics would more likely want to say "that the wind appears hot to me is true" (simpliciter) rather than "'The wind is hot' is true-for-me." The Cyrenaic position retains the possibility of error whenever you go beyond the immediate content of your experience, whereas Protagoras says that however things appear to you is 'true for you.' According to the Cyrenaics, I may know infallibly that "I am being appeared to hotly now," but if I were to say that the wind itself were hot, I might be mistaken, and if I were to judge that "You are being appeared to hotly now," whereas in fact you were having a chilly experience, I would be mistaken. Protagoras, as depicted in the Theaetetus, does away with the possibility of people genuinely contradicting one another, since all statements are about how things appear to the individual making the statement, and hence all (sincere) statements turn out to be true--for that individual, at that time.

Also, when Protagoras says that each us can judge infallibly how things 'appear' to us, the sense of 'appearance' that Protagoras is using extends beyond the initial restricted sense of phenomenal appearances, e.g., a wind feeling hot or a wall seeming white, to cover beliefs generally. That is, if I believe that "the laws of Athens are just," then Protagoras would say that this is equivalent to "it seems to me that the laws of Athens are just." And since each of us can judge infallibly about our own appearances, I can also know that it is true (for me) that "the laws of Athens are just." The Cyrenaics retain the more restricted sense of 'appearance,' where each of can know infallibly our immediate perceptual states, for instance, knowing that I am having a red experience, but this does not extend to knowledge of laws 'appearing' to be just, or the future 'appearing' to be hopeful.

ii. The Cyrenaics and Pyrrhonian Skeptics

The later academic and Pyrrhonian skeptics make use of arguments from the relativity of perception to try to refute the position of dogmatists, like the Stoics and the Epicureans, who claim that we can gain knowledge of the external world on the basis of sense-perception. However, although the Cyrenaics might properly be called 'skeptics,' their skepticism differs from the skepticism of the Pyrrhonists in at least three respects.

The first difference is that the Cyrenaics claim that we can have knowledge of the contents of our experiences, while the Pyrrhonists disavow any knowledge whatsoever. However, this difference might not be as significant as it seems, since the Pyrrhonists do acknowledge that we can accurately report how things appear to us--e.g., that the wind appears hot. However, they refuse to say that this qualifies as knowledge, since knowledge concerns how things are, not merely how they appear to us.

The second difference is that the Cyrenaics claim that it is impossible to gain knowledge of the external world, while the Pyrrhonists claim neither that one can nor that one cannot gain such knowledge. The Pyrrhonists would label the Cyrenaic position as a form of 'negative dogmatism,' since the Cyrenaics do advance assertions about the impossibility of knowledge of the external world. This is a type of second-order purported 'knowledge' about the limits of our knowledge, and the Pyrrhonists, as true skeptics, do not make even these types of pronouncements.

Third, although the Cyrenaics do claim that it is impossible to gain knowledge of what the external world is like, it is not as clear that they doubt that there exists an external world, which the Pyrrhonists do. Some sources ascribe to the Cyrenaics the position that whether there is an external world is not known, while others ascribe to them the position that we can know that there is an external world that is the cause of our experiences, but that we cannot know what this world is like. The latter position fits in more smoothly with the way the Cyrenaics conceive of experiences, as effects of external causes ("I am being yellowed"), but has obvious difficulties of its own. (For instance, if we can know nothing about what characteristics objects in the external world have, what basis do we have to think that these objects exist?) However, if this is what the Cyrenaics think, a parallel can be drawn between their position and what Immanuel Kant says about the existence of the noumenal world of 'things in themselves,' which is the unknowable source of the data which ultimately forms our experiences.

Finally, the Cyrenaic position, at least in the limited reports we have concerning it, does not appear to be as fully-developed as that of the later skeptics. The academic and Pyrrhonian skeptics engaged in long controversies with the dogmatists, and as a result, they needed to answer the objections of the dogmatists, e.g., that it is impossible to live as a skeptic, or that skepticism is self-refuting. The Cyrenaics, as far as we know, do not address these questions.

3. Ethics

The Cyrenaics are unabashed sensual hedonists: the highest good is my own pleasure, with all else being valuable only as a means to securing my own pleasure, and bodily pleasures are better than mental pleasures. Their iconoclastic theory stands well outside the mainstream of Greek ethical thought, with the traditional virtues of moderation, justice, and friendship being disparaged by them.
3a. The Value and Nature of Pleasure

The Cyrenaics start from the Greek ethical commonplace that the highest good is what we all seek for its own sake, and not for the sake of anything else. This they identify as pleasure, because we instinctively seek pleasure for its own sake, and when we achieve pleasure, we want nothing more. Similarly, pain is bad because we shun it.

When the Cyrenaics say that 'pleasure' is the highest good, they do not mean that pleasure in general in good, so that we should seek to maximize the overall amount of pleasure in the world, as utilitarians say. Instead, they mean that, for each of us, our own pleasure is what is valuable to us, because that is what each of us seeks. Also, each of us can only experience our own pleasures, and not the pleasures of other people. Thus, the Cyrenaic view is a form of egoistic hedonism.

Pleasure and pain are both 'movements,' according to the Cyrenaics: pleasure a smooth motion, and pain a rough motion. The absence of either type of motion is an intermediate state which is neither pleasurable nor painful. This is directed against Epicurus' theory that thehomeostatic state of being free of pain, need and worry is itself most pleasant. The Cyrenaics make fun of the Epicurean theory by saying that this state of being free of desires and pain is the condition of a corpse.

The Cyrenaics admit that there are both bodily pleasures (for example, sexual gratification) and mental pleasures (e.g., delight at the prosperity of one's country), and they maintain, against the Epicureans, that not all mental pleasures are based upon bodily pleasures. However, they exalt bodily over mental pleasures, presumably because bodily pleasures are much more vivid than mental pleasures. They also assert that bodily pains are worse than mental pains, and give as evidence for this claim that criminals are punished with bodily instead of mental pains.

b. Pleasure, Happiness, and Prudence

One of the most striking features of Cyrenaic ethics is their assertion that it is pleasure, and not happiness, which is the highest good. Almost all other Greek theorists agree that happiness is the highest good, but disagree about what happiness consists in. Even Epicurus, who is a hedonist, remains within this tradition by asserting that happiness is the same as leading a pleasant life. The Cyrenaics, however, say that what we really seek are individual pleasures, e.g., the pleasure of eating a steak. Happiness, which is thought of as the sum of all of these individual pleasures, is valuable only because of the value of each of the individual pleasures that make it up.

Another striking feature of the Cyrenaic theory is its lack of future-concern. The Cyrenaics advocate going after whatever will bring one pleasure now, enjoying the pleasure while one is experiencing it, and not worrying too much about what the future will bring. Although the Cyrenaics say that prudence is valuable for attaining pleasure, they do not seem much concerned with exercising self-control in pursuing pleasure, or with deferring present pleasures (or undergoing present pains) for the sake of experiencing greater pleasure (or avoiding greater pains) in the future.

This lack of future-concern is not a direct consequence of their hedonism, nor of their privileging of bodily over mental pleasures. If pleasure is the highest good, and one wants to maximize the pleasure in one's life, then the natural position to take is the one Socrates lays out in Plato's dialogue the Protagoras. Socrates describes a type of hedonism in which one uses a 'measuring art' to weigh equally all of the future pleasures and pains one would experience . Although present pleasures might seem more alluring than distant ones, Socrates maintains that this is like an optical illusion in which nearer objects seem larger than distant ones, and that one must correct for this distortion if one is going to plan one's life rationally. Epicurus, likewise, says that the wise person is willing to forgo some particular pleasure if that pleasure will bring one greater pain in the future. Simply indulging in whatever pleasures are close at hand will ultimately bring one unhappiness.

The texts we have do not allow us to obtain with any degree of confidence the reasons that the Cyrenaics have for their advocacy of the pleasures of the moment. There are at least three plausible speculations, however:

i. Personal Identity and Momentary Pleasure

The first reason that the Cyrenaics might have for rejecting long-term planning about one's pursuits is that they are skeptical about personal identity across time. If all I have access to are momentary, fluctuating experiences, what reason do I have to think that the 'self' that exists today will be the same 'self' as the person who will bear my name 30 years hence? After all, in most respects, a person at 30 years old is almost completely different from that 'same' person at 10, and the 'same' person at 50 will also be much changed. So, if what I desire is pleasure for myself, what reason do I have to sacrifice my pleasures for the sake of the pleasures of that 'other' person down the temporal stream from myself? Nursing a hangover, or deep in debt, that future self might curse the past self for his intemperance, but what concern is that of mine?

If the Cyrenaics do believe that personal identity does not persist over time, their position would be similar to one espoused by Protagoras in the Theaetetus. Because of the similarities between the Protagorean and Cyrenaic epistemologies, as well as the fact that having such a position would help make sense of the Cyrenaics' focus on pursuing present pleasures, some scholars have attributed this view of personal identity to the Cyrenaics. However, there is little direct evidence that they held such a view, and the way they describe people and objects seems, indeed, to presuppose their identity across time.

ii. The Self-Defeating Nature of Future-Concern

The Cyrenaics may also think that planning for the future, and trying to assure happiness by foregoing present pleasures for the sake of the future, is self-defeating. If this is right, then it is not the case that the Cyrenaics think that future pleasures and pains are unimportant, it is simply that they believe that worrying about the future is futile. One gains happiness, and maximizes the pleasure in one's life, not by anxiously planning one's future out, and toiling on behalf of the future, but simply by enjoying whatever pleasures are immediately at hand, without worrying about the long-term consequences.

The Cyrenaics think that "to pile up the pleasures which produce happiness is most unpleasant," because one will need to be choosing things which are painful for the sake of future pleasures. The Cyrenaics instead aim at enjoying the pleasures that are present, without letting themselves be troubled at what is not present, i.e., the past and future. Epicurus thinks that the memory of past pleasures, and the expectation of future pleasures, are themselves most pleasant, and hence he emphasizes the importance of careful planning in arranging what one will experience in the future. The Cyrenaics, however, deny this, saying that pleasures are pleasant only when actually being experienced.

iii. Present Preferences and Future-Concern

Finally, the Cyrenaics lack of future-concern may result from radically relativizing the good to one's present preferences. It's reported that Aristippus "discerned the good by the single present time alone," and later Cyrenaics assert that there is no telos--goal or good--to life asa whole; instead, particular actions and desires each aim at some particular pleasure. So the notion of some overall goal or good for one's entire life is rejected and is replaced by a succession of short-terms goals. As one's desires change over time, what is good for you at that time likewise changes, and at each moment, it makes sense to try to satisfy the desires that one has at that time, without regard to the desires one may happen to have in the future.

If the Cyrenaics thought that to choose rationally is to endeavor to maximize the fulfillment of one's present preferences, their position would be analogous to the model of economic rationality put forward by current philosophers like David Gauthier.

c. Custom, Morality, and Friendship

In ancient times, the Cyrenaics were among the most dismissive of traditional Greek morality. They say that nothing is just or base by nature: what is just or base is set entirely by the customs and conventions of particular societies. So, for instance, there is nothing in the world or in human nature that makes incest, or stealing, or parricide wrong in themselves. However, these things become base in a particular society because the laws and customs of that society designate those practices as base. You should normally refrain from wrong-doing, not because wrong-doing is bad in itself, but because of the punishments that you will suffer if you are caught.

Many of the stories surrounding Aristippus stress his willingness to do things that were considered demeaning or shocking, like putting on a woman's robes when the king commands it, or exposing his child to die with no remorse when it was an inconvenience. Although most of these stories are malicious and probably untrue, they do seem to have a basis in the Cyrenaics' disregard of conventions of propriety when they think they can get away with it. All pleasures are good, they say, even ones that result from unseemly behavior.

The Cyrenaic attitude toward friendship also is consistent with their egoistic hedonism and well outside the traditional attitudes toward friendship. Friendship, according to the Cyrenaics, is entered into for self-interested motives. That is, we obtain friends simply because we believe that by doing so we will be in a better position to obtain pleasure for ourselves, not because we think that the friendship is valuable for its own sake, or because we love our friend for his own sake.

d. Later Cyrenaics

Around the time of Epicurus, a number of offshoot sects of Cyrenaicism sprung up. They seemed to have been concerned mainly with modifying or elaborating Cyrenaic ethics.

i. Hegesias

Hegesias is an extremely pessimistic philosopher. He maintains that happiness is impossible to achieve, because the body and mind are subject to a great deal of suffering, and what happens to us is a result of fortune and not under our control. Pleasure is good, and pain evil, but life as such is neither good nor evil. It is reported (maybe spuriously) that Hegesias was known as the 'death-persuader,' and that he was forbidden to lecture because so many members of his audience would kill themselves after listening to him.

Hegesias stresses that every action is done for entirely self-interested motives, and because of this, he denies that friendship exists. This assumes, of course, that one cannot truly be a friend if one enters into the friendship for entirely self-interested reasons.

ii. Anniceris

Anniceris moderated the extreme psychological egoism of Hegesias. He says that friendship does exist, that we should not cherish our friends merely for the sake of their usefulness to us, and that we will willingly deprive ourselves of pleasures because of our love of our friends.

He also says, however, that our end is our own pleasure, and that the happiness of our friend is not desirable for its own sake, since we feel only our own pleasure, not that of our friend. It is not clear how he makes these different parts of his theory consistent with one another.

iii. Theodorus

Theodorus was a pupil of Anniceris. His main innovation is the rejection of the thesis that pleasure and pain are the things that are intrinsically good and evil. Instead, he says that these are intermediates, and that the experience of joy is the highest good, and the feeling of grief the worst evil. (Theodorus may mean to relegate only bodily pleasures and pains to the status of intermediates, since it is natural to think of joy as a mental pleasure and grief as a mental pain.)

He also believes that friendship does not exist, since wise people are self-sufficient and do not need friends, while the unwise enter into friendship merely to satisfy their needs (and hence are not really friends). He also says that acts like adultery, theft and sacrilege are sometimes allowable, since these acts are not bad by nature, but are simply looked down upon because of societal prejudices, which are engendered in order to keep the masses in line.

4. Ancient Sources

None of Cyrenaics' own writings survive. Thus, in order to reconstruct their views, we need to rely on secondary and tertiary sources which summarize the outlines of Cyrenaic doctrines, or mention the Cyrenaics in passing while discussing some other topic. These sources are not always reliable, and they are often sketchy, so our knowledge of the Cyrenaics is incomplete and tentative. In particular, our sources often mention what the philosophical position of a Cyrenaic is, without recording what his arguments were for that position.

Our main source for Cyrenaic epistemology is Sextus Empiricus, a doctor and Pyrrhonian skeptic who probably lived in the second century A.D. He is a careful and intelligent writer, although he is a fairly late source and is also sometimes polemical. He mentions the Cyrenaics in several places, but his most extended discussion of them occurs in Against the Professors VII 190-200. Another important source for Cyrenaic epistemology is the treatise Against Colotes, by the essayist Plutarch (c. 50-120 A.D.), a Platonist. The main topic of the essay is an attack on Epicurean epistemology, but Plutarch also deals with the Epicurean criticisms of the Cyrenaics in 1120c-1121e.

Our main source for the lives and ethics of the Cyrenaics is Diogenes Laertius, who probably lived in the third century A.D. His 10-book Lives of the Philosophers is a gossipy compendium of what other people have said about the lives and thought of many philosophers. Book 2 includes a discussion of Aristippus and the Cyrenaics. It is stuffed with reports of the Cyrenaics' scandalous behavior and witty repartee, almost all of which are probably scurrilous, but it also has a valuable summary of the Cyrenaics' ethical doctrines.

5. References and Further Reading

This is not meant as comprehensive bibliography; rather, it's a selection of a few recent books and articles to read for those who want to learn more about the Cyrenaics. The books and articles listed below have extensive bibliographies for those looking for more specialized and scholarly publications.

  • The Epistemology of the Cyrenaic School, by Voula Tsouna, Cambridge University Press. 1998.
    • This is the only book-length study of Cyrenaic epistemology available in English. It is written for an audience of specialists in ancient philosophy, and hence gets a little technical at places for the non-specialist. However, the discussion is very clear overall, and Tsouna does an excellent job of assessing the sources we have and of relating the Cyrenaic's position to those of both ancient and modern philosophers. There is also an appendix which contains translations of almost all of the ancient sources we have that are significant for understanding Cyrenaic epistemology.
  • The Morality of Happiness, by Julia Annas, Oxford University Press. 1993.
    • There are no recent books in English available which focus on the Cyrenaic's ethics. This book deals with all major ancient theorists from Aristotle on, but it is still a good introduction to Cyrenaic ethics. Annas concentrates on the respects in which the Cyrenaics are out of step with other ancient ethical theories.
  • "The Cyrenaics on Pleasure, Happiness, and Future-Concern," by Tim O'Keefe, Phronesis, vol. 47 no. 4 (2002), 395-416.
    • This article explores the question of why the Cyrenaics, alone among ancient Greek ethical theorists, claim that happiness is not the highest good, but particular pleasures are instead, and that one should not worry about the long-term consequences of one's actions but instead concentrate on obtaining pleasures that are near at hand.

Author Information

Tim O'Keefe
Email: (see web page)
Georgia State University
U. S. A.

Bhartrihari (c. 450—510 C.E.)

Bhartrihari may be considered one of the most original philosophers of language and religion in ancient India. He is known primarily as a grammarian, but his works have great philosophical significance, especially with regard to the connections they posit between grammar, logic, semantics, and ontology. His thought may be characterized as part of the shabdadvaita (word monistic) school of thought, which asserts that cognition and language at an ultimate level are ontologically identical concepts that refer to one supreme reality, Brahman. Bhartrihari interprets the notion of the originary word (shabda) as transcending the bounds of spoken and written language and meaning. Understood as shabda tattva-the "word principle," this complex idea explains the nature of consciousness, the awareness of all forms of phenomenal appearances, and posits an identity obtains between these, which is none other than Brahman. It is thus language as a fundamentally ontological principle that accounts for how we are able to conceptualize and communicate the awareness of objects. The metaphysical notion of shabda Brahman posits the unity of all existence as the foundation for all linguistically designated individual phenomena.

Table of Contents

  1. Bhartrihari's Life and Works
  2. Early Grammarians and Philosophical Semantics
  3. Brahman, Language, and the World
  4. Bhartrihari's Grammar
  5. The Sphota Theory of Language
  6. Phenomenology of Language and the Concept of Shabda-Brahman
  7. Bhartrihari and Western Philosophy
  8. References and Further Reading

1. Bhartrihari's Life and Works

Bhartrihari's works were so widely known that even the Chinese traveler Yijing (I-Tsing) (635-713 CE) mentions the grammarian-philosopher, mistaking him for a Buddhist. Unfortunately, we do not know much about his personal history and his works do not throw much light on the matter. There are some narratives referring to his background but they are not supported by historical data. In these somewhat dubious accounts, he is said to have been existentially torn between two kinds of life: the path of pleasure and that of the monastic yogi. Although he believed that he should renounce the world of material pleasures (reflected in poetry attributed to him by scholars), it took many attempts to finally achieve the life of dispassion. His hedonism and philosophical acumen led him, according to his legend, to produce works of great breadth, depth and beauty.

Bhartrihari credits some of the theories in his work Vâkyapadîya to his teacher, who was probably one of Candrâcârya's contemporaries, Vasurata. To be more precise, the noted scholar T.R.V. Murti proposes the following chronology: Vasurata, followed by Bhartrihari (450-510 CE) and Dinnâga (Dignâga) (480-540 CE). Among the major works attributed to Bhartrihari are his main philosophical treatise, Vâkyapadîya (On Sentences and Words) kândas I, II, and III, Mahâbhâshyatîkâ (a commentary on the Mahâbhâshya of Patanjali), Vâkyapadîyavrtti (a commentary on the Vâkyapadîya kândas I and II), and shabdadhâtusamîksha. Since 1884, the Vâkyapadîya, containing approximately 635 verses, has been edited and published several times in English translation.

The first two chapters of the Vâkyapadîya discuss the nature of creation, the relationship of Brahman, world, language, the individual soul (jîva), and the manifestation and comprehension of the meanings of words and sentences. In addition, the literary works attributed by some to Bhartrihari (not mentioned here) have made an impact on the growing popular Hindu devotional (bhakti) movements. More importantly, his philosophical work was recognized and addressed by schools of Hindu scriptural exegesis (Mîmâmsâ), Vedânta (mystical Vedism) and Buddhism.

2. Early Grammarians and Philosophical Semantics

In ancient India, grammarians saw their task as establishing the foundations of the Vedas, but their work often resulted in the development of their own philosophical systems. Patanjali, in his Mahâbhâshya, explains that the study of grammar (vyâkaranam) was meant to maintain the truth of the Vedas, to guide the use of Vedic speech in ritual contexts, and to aid in the clear interpretations of individual human speech. Both Pânini and Patanjali, two major Sanksrit grammarians, were the first to provide a systematic and formal analysis of the grammatical bases of all intended meanings. Pânini (7th century BCE) developed the Ashtâdhyâyî (Eight-Chapters) for the grammarians. This impressive work contains a thorough analysis of the rules of Sanskrit language down into its nominal and verbal components; it contains a science of language, applicable to the Vedas, also comprised of sets of operational rules and meta -rules that interpret the former. Among these "rules for interpretation" of Vedic texts, we are given a “universal grammar. Pânini's approach is not like the Mîmâmsâ, which focuses on the study of Vedic language. Instead, Pânini deals with spoken and Vedic languages as if they are of the same genre.

Pânini's Ashtâdhyâyî, its commentaries, and the Vâkyapadîya of Bhartrihari are said to constitute the fundamental texts for the school of Pânini’s grammar, whose object of study was ultimately Vedic. Around 150 BCE, Patanjali wrote the Mahâbhâshya, an interpretation of some of Pânini’s rules written in dialogue form, and it is this work that is the basis for later commentaries on grammar and philosophy. It is of interest to note here that the Dharmashâstras or Treatises on Law, including the well-known Laws of Manu, were composed between 322 and 183 BCE. J.N. Mohanty points out that these treatises can be seen as attempts on the part of orthodox Brahminism to preserve itself against the anti-Vedic philosophies. However, he considers Pânini’s grammar and Patanjali’s commentary to carry greater weight in the Indian philosophical tradition.

With the Vâkyapadîya, Bhartrihari moves grammatical analysis squarely into the realm of philosophy, arguing that grammar can be consider a darshana, a "view," or an official philosophical school, providing perspective and insight into ultimate reality. The first verse articulates the fundamental view of his newly envisaged school:

The Brahman is without beginning and end, whose essence is the Word, who is the cause of the manifested phonemes, who appears as the objects, from whom the creation of the world proceeds.

It is the project of the Vâkyapadîya to explain this verse, with all of its philosophical, linguistic, and metaphysical implications. At base, we contextualize Bhartrihari's philosophical inquiry into language as being conditioned by the Indian culture and scriptural tradition, in which this type of intellectual pursuit had a soteriological purpose -the realization of absolute knowledge and the spiritual liberation which ensues; thus, it is a distinctively ontological reflection on language which Bhartrihari added to the thought of earlier grammarians.

3. Brahman, Language, and the World

The Brahminic view of the cosmos put forth in the Vedas is one of constant and cyclical creation and dissolution. At the dissolution of each creative cycle a seed or trace (samskâra) is left behind out of which the next cycle arises. What is significant here is that the nature of the seed from which each cycle of creation bursts forth is expressed as "Divine Word" (Daivi Vâk). If language is of divine origin, it can be conceived as Being Brahman expressing and embodying itself in the plurality of phenomena that is creation.

Bhartrihari considers Brahman, the basis of reality, to be "without beginning and end" (anâdi nidhânam), as a concept that is not subject to the attributes of temporal sequences of events, either externally or in the succession of mental events that form cognitions. The word principle, shabda Brahman, is not defined in terms of the temporal nature of our cognitive states, because it functions as the inherent, primordial ground of all cognitions. Thus, against the Hindu logicians, the Nyâyas, for whom particular forms of human speech may be expressed in conventional terms for practical purposes, language itself is not something which arises or is created in time by God or humans. As B.K. Matilal states, “To talk of an absolute beginning of language is untenable. Language is continuous and co-terminus with human existence or the existence of any sentient being.”

There has been some scholarly debate regarding the meaning of the term "eternal" or “akshara” as Bhartrihari applies it to the word-principle. While some interpret this to refer to an all-pervading entity, existing in opposition to the multiplicity of objects in space and time, others see it as Bhartrihari's specialized way of referring to phonemes, the minimal units of meaningful sound. It seems that phonemes understood in this way explain how it is the case that Word appears as objects. Eternity is “that which appears as objects, and from whom the creation of the world proceeds.” Phonemes are thus the eternally possible elements that can be combined in inexhaustible ways to manifest the plurality of nature.

This principle accounts for creation on a number of levels: it is the origin of consciousness, of cognition, sensation, language use, cognitive and experiential aspects of the world. In other words, objects of thought and the relations between them are word-determined, regardless of whether they are objects of perception, inference or any other kind of knowledge. When we perceptually apprehend external reality, we always do so in terms of names, for without names objects are neither identifiable nor knowable.

Furthermore, when we consider phenomenal concepts, we see that they do not exist or hold any meaning aside from the words through which they are expressed; we might say that our concepts are "word-loaded" and from this we can infer that the word principle causes the world. Bhartrihari's causal claim is in keeping with the traditional philosophical discussions on the nature of causality and inference as he applies it to the word-principle:

Just as other thinkers, while explaining causality, saw that the properties of cause continue in the effects….in the same way in the scriptures also, the word in which the power of Enjoyer and Enjoyed are submerged has been declared as the cause of the world.

4. Bhartrihari's Grammar

In the Vâkyapadîya, kânda I, Bhartrihari defines the scope of his inquiry as the subjects of grammar. Our speech takes the form of the basic structures of language, and grammar deals with this communicatively spoken language. The correct understanding of speech can take us to the limits of our conventional and spiritual capacities, and so language analysis must operate at all the following levels: 1. sentences and words, 2. meanings corresponding to sentences and words, 3. the fitness or compatibility between sound and sense, and 4. the spiritual merit obtained by using the correct language.

In the Sanskrit grammatical tradition, the "elite" are defined as those who use the correct language; we arrive at this standard language by abstracting from communicative language, or “language-in-use.” In his linguistic theory, Bhartrihari distinguishes between two forms of language, the spoken, or “language-in-use” and the analytic. The analytic or formal language emerges from a formal, abstract analysis of communicative language. If we were to gather and compare various sentences and words from different contexts of use, we would logically infer the basic segments (roots, stems, suffixes) that account for a common logical or formal basis of denotation.

This hierarchical conception of language use and language meaning can be understood in the following way, taking off from a representation of Matilal, with the term on the far right of each column understood as the originator of the term in the middle, and the term in the middle being the originator of the term on the left. In other words, Bhartrihari's conception of utterance and understanding can be grasped with the following schema under the rubric of:

Product Producer Derivative Element
Linguistic Components Language-in-Use Analytic Language
sentences and words word stems, suffixes, etc..
sense sentence meaning and word meaning stem meaning and suffix meaning
sound and sense relations fitness compatibility causality relations
purpose spiritual merit correct knowledge

There is debate about the ontological and epistemological status of relations between these levels of language, and Bhartrihari's commentary on grammar includes a review of several theories and ultimately he seems to favor the "naturalist view." In the first chapter of the Vâkyapadîya, Bhartrihari explains the naturalist view. Following the pâdavâdins (those who regard the word as the primary indivisible unit) who consider word-constituents, such as roots and suffixes, to be mere fictitious abstractions from words, so also the vâkyavâdins (those who regard the sentence as the indivisible unit) consider words to be imaginary abstractions from the sentence. The naturalists, such as Pânini, believe that language has an invariant form expressed in grammar. They therefore give epistemic primacy to spoken language; formal language is only an “appearance” and secondary aid to understanding. The conventionalists, on the other hand, hold that the analytic language is primary in that it contains within it all the structural features that may be used to create meaningful speech.

5. The Sphota Theory of Language

Bhartrihari's theory occupies an interesting place in the ongoing Hindu-Buddhist debates about meaning and reference. For the Buddhists, meaning is a function of social and linguistic convention and reference is ultimately a projection of imaginative consciousness. For the Brahminic Nyâyas or Logicians, words have meaning because they refer to external objects; words can be combined in sentences just like things exist in relation to one another in external reality. With Advaita Vedânta, words mask the meaning of the Absolute Self (Âtman) which is Brahman, so that, when a person predicates categories to their identity such as in the sentence "I am tall," this predication masks the all-inclusive nature of the eternal Self, which is beyond categorization. Bhartrihari puts forth a theory of language which, rather than starting by taking fundamental ontological, epistemological or social sides in these well-established debates, starts from the question of how meaning happens, how it emerges from the acts of both speaker and audience, and, constructing this theory first, what he believes to be appropriate metaphysical, epistemological and soteriological implications are drawn from it.

For Bhartrihari, linguistic meaning cannot be conveyed or accounted for by the physical utterance and perception of sounds, so he puts forth the sphota theory: the theory which posits the meaning-unit, which for him is the sentence, as a single entity. The term "sphota" dates back to Pânini's reference to “sphotâyana” in his treatise Ashtâdhyâyî, however it was Patanjali who explicitly discusses sphota in his Mahâbhâshya. According to him sphota signifies spoken language, with the audible sound (dhvani) as its special quality. In Bhartrihari’s treatment of this concept, while the audible noise may vary depending on the speaker’s mode of utterance, sphota as the meaning unit of speech is not subject to such variations. This is so because for Bhartrihari, meaning is conveyed by the sentence. To explicate this theory, Bhartrihari depends on the root of sphota, namely sphut, meaning “to burst forth…” as in the “idea that spews forth” (in an internal mental state) when a meaningful sound, the sentence as a whole, is uttered.

The meaning of the sentence, the speech-unit, is one entire cognitive content (samvit). The sentence is indivisible (akhanda) and owes its cognitive value to the meaning-whole. Thus, its meaning is not reducible to its parts, the individual words which are distinguished only for the purposes of convention or expression. The differentiated word-meanings, which are also ontological categories, are the abstracted "pieces" we produce using imaginative construction, or vikalpa. Sphota entails a kind of mental perception which is described as a moment of recognition, an instantaneous flash (pratibhâ), whereby the hearer is made conscious, through hearing sounds, of the latent meaning unit already present in his consciousness (unconscious). The sentence employs analyzable units to express its meaning, but that meaning emerges out of the particular concatenation of those units, not because those units are meaningful in themselves. We analyze language by splitting it up into words, prefixes, suffixes, etc….but this is indicative of the fact that we “misunderstand” the fundamental oneness of the speech-unit. Words are only abstracted meaning possibilities in this sense, whereas the uttered sentence is the realization of a meaning-whole irreducible to those parts in themselves. This fundamental unity seems to apply, also, to any language taken as a whole. Matilal explains: “it is only those who do not know the language thoroughly who analyze it into words, in order to get a connected meaning.” As this scholar suggests, it is rather remarkable that Bhartrihari's recognition of the theoretical indivisibility of the sentence resonates with the contemporary linguistic view of learning sentences as wholes (at a later stage of development we build new sentences from learned first sentences through analogical reasoning).

Sphota is therefore the cause of manifested language, which is meant to convey meaning. Sphota is more specifically identified as the underlying totality of linguistic capability, or "potency" and secondarily as the cause of two differentiated aspects of manifested meaning: applied meaning expressed as dhvani, the audible sound patterns of speech and artha-language as meaning-bearing. The grammatical/syntactical parts of the underlying sphota can only be heard and understood through its phonetic elements. Bhartrihari explains that the apparent difference between sphota and dhvani arises as we utter words. Initially, the word exists in the mind of the speaker as a unity but is manifested as a sequence of different sounds-thus giving the appearance of differentiation. dhvanis may be more specifically described as merely the audible possibility of meaning, a necessary but hardly sufficient condition of meaning.

We might think of this unit of linguistic potency, the sphota, as the cognitive/propositional whole content of meaning that can be transposed into different languages, while the actual word-sounds comprise the contents of the "speech-act". But what holds the act to its ability to convey intended meanings? The words sounded by a plurality of speakers comprise the physical manifestation of vâk or vaikharî-vâk and it is upon this form of vâk that physical objects as objective forms are modeled. The unity that underlies these objective referents and meanings, however, is known as the intuited vâk-pashyati-vâk, which makes possible the unmediated understanding of a complete linguistic expression. This intuitive level of understanding, constitutive of the sphota, is teleological in its nature and structure in that it contains all potential possibilities of meaning-bearing dhvanis and their order of manifestation.

But, what guarantees that the hearer of speech properly comprehends what is uttered? In the second book of the Vâkyapadîya, Bhartrihari states:

Sentence meaning is produced by word meanings but is not constituted by them. Its form is that Intuition, that innate "know how" awareness (pratibhâ) possessed by all beings. It is a cognitive state evident to the hearer…not describable or definable, but all practical activities depend on it directly or through recollection of it.

Pratibhâ intuition can be characterized as shabda, the very same speech principle externalized in the utterances of speakers, as it operates within the hearer, causing her to instantaneously comprehend the meaning of the utterance. However, linguistic convention, shared by speaker and hearer, cannot account for the flash of comprehension. If that were the case, we would not have instances where communication breaks down in spite of the shared language between speaker and hearer. The comprehension of meaning lies in the sphota that is already present in the hearer's awareness. As she hears the succession of audible phonemes, the latent and undifferentiated language potency within her is brought to "fruition" in the form of grasping the speaker’s meaning. Thus, while the audible words are necessary for such verbal comprehension to occur in the hearer, they are not sufficient. It is her own ability to understand meaning referred to by these words, by virtue of sharing the same sphota with the speaker, which completes the act of cognition.

It is at this point that the philosophy of language has for Bhartrihari religious implications of both ontological and interpretive scope. Just as various sentences might sound different in the mouths of different speakers and yet convey the same meanings, various Vedas may seem different in form and style, but there is a unity carried by the underlying sphota, which ensures that it is the same truth, or dharma that is expressed throughout the texts. Bearing in mind that Brahman is the ultimate referent of all speech forms, this higher reality is manifested in the sacred texts-whose efficacy (ritual, soteriological, epistemological) depends upon our ability to correctly apprehend its meaning. The sphota concept makes such interpretation possible. Again, the sphota expresses a meaning-whole behind individual letters and words. The implication for the truth of Vedic discourse is clear, for that truth is already present in the speaker (the Veda) and is potentially present in the consciousness of the hearers (the practitioners).

According to Bhartrihari's theory, we can justify this particular philosophical method as revelatory by using the concept of shabdapramâna. The implications of this method are explained in the following section; here, we examine the source of our cognitions. But in order for one to give their assent to a worldview that renders to language the cosmic and salvific roles Bhartrihari does, a theory that posits that language is the medium of ultimate knowledge, one must be convinced that language in general has the capacity to yield ordinary knowledge. Given the way Bhartrihari conceptualizes language, as not primarily referent directed, but instead as referent-constructing, we need to look at how the grammarian thematizes the knowledge-conferring power of language within his own peculiarly unique framework.

6. Phenomenology of Language and the Concept of Shabda-Brahman

Sphota may be characterized as the intersubjective, universal "store-house" of meaning, the ground of all linguistic activity and communication. Sphota is the unifying principle that connects the word, the grammatical form of the word, and the meaning. Furthermore, just as words and sentences represent “pieces” of the meaning extracted from the whole, the objects and states of affairs these pieces represent actually refer to a “whole of objects meant” or an entire reality.

In classical Indian thought, objects are thought to be constituted of substance (dravya), but in Bhartrihari and especially in his first major commentator Helârâja, substance can be distinguished into two kinds, the substance of all things, which is Brahman, and the other individual, empirical substances. The empirical notion of substance here may be derived from the grammatical operation of ekashesha, explained by Pânini as using individual word-tokens to refer to individual objects-substances. Thus, names or singular terms are said by the earliest grammarians to refer to one substance at a time, therefore substance is defined through the relation of reference, and the nature of each substance is so specific that we cannot posit any general properties possessed by all of them. For example, each time we say the word 'cow' we refer to a different cow, and each cow is actually a different wholly individual entity.

Bhartrihari defines "actual" or empirical substance as that which we refer to by using indexicals and quantifiers, which refer to anything in our ontological reality: 'this' ‘that’ ‘something’ or ‘anything.’ The term ‘this’ points out an existence given to perception, while ‘that’ refers to something whose existence can be validated by some other means of knowledge but which is not available to perception. Bhartrihari also acknowledges the pragmatic and common sense view of “substance” as “a relative concept being dependent on our concept of quality (guna). A substance is that which is said to be distinguished and a quality is that which distinguishes the substance.

But Bhartrihari's contribution to this debate changes the very notion of substance into a much more inclusive and general concept, since anything we refer to using a name or substantive term, even generic properties and verbs, become substances in that they are distinguished by words, as Matilal illustrates: "Thus, cooking would refer to the fact of cooking and 'walking’ to the fact of walking as long as the speaker intends to distinguish the act of cooking from the act of walking." “In the third book of the Vâkyapadîya, he defines the concept of ‘quality’/guna as dependent upon, as arising from substance. He rejects the Vaisheshika view that substances and qualities belong to entirely different categories (padârtha-s), and espouses the revolutionary view that the latter arises from the former. For him, qualities, existing in relation to substances serve to further differentiate those substances by “delimiting their scope.” But how does he account for such a radical revisioning?

Bhartrihari's contribution of his particular theory of the "imaginative construction" of perceptions and language once again emerges within the context of debates with competing theories of knowledge. The Buddhist idealistic claim also argued that the world of experience or phenomena is at base a product of the human imaginative faculty. The Buddhists claim that our cognitive experiences construct our reality; these are modes of consciousness containing cognitive contents and in the final analysis, do not yield any knowledge about reality as it may be outside of themselves. It is consciousness that posits the (apparent) externality of objects, not the “objects themselves.” This form of phenomenal-idealism is developed as a counterclaim to the Hindu realist position, which affirms the existence of external reality. For the Buddhist, objects are only the external contents of the human imagination. Interestingly enough, Bhartrihari’s sphota theory of language and cognition is sometimes understood as an extension of the Buddhist position; according to the grammarian, cognition is entirely language-dependent in that the structure of our cognitive states is determined by grammar. But Bhartrihari’s theory posits knowledge as a matter of specifically linguistic construction. The concept of vikalpa for him implies the following: the structure of language shapes how we categorize the objects of our experience and our descriptions of reality as a whole. Even at the most immediate levels of awareness), we must conceptualize and therefore interpret the contents of sense perception. Thus, at the level of pure sensation, the sensory core is already saturated, as it were, with the “deep structure” of language. In this respect, Bhartrihari’s position differs from the Buddhist position rather dramatically. The Buddhists clearly distinguish between pure perception (nirvikalpa-pratyaksha), which is pre-conceptual, unverbalizable and correspondent to reality, and constructed perception (savikalpa-pratyakasha) that is conceptual and may therefore be considered a verbalized interpretation of the real. For the Buddhist, the pure sensory core is the real locus of perception. Bhartrihari, as an ontological monist, does not distinguish between a pure perception and a constructed perception such that the former is concept-free and ineffable and the latter concept-loaded and autonomously constructed, because he thinks that perception is inherently verbal. Not only are sense data and linguistic units non-different, but they are expressive of the unitary principle of Brahman-which is differentiated into the plurality of linguistic objects that make up the world.

Bhartrihari's notion of vikalpa is also directed against the early Nyaiyayikas, who, while agreeing on the correspondence between word and thing, uphold the distinction between language and its object-referents. These Hindu Logicians held that the perceptual apprehension of the object could be distinguished from naming the object. For the Nyâyas, who are ontological pluralists and materialists, words refer to distinct generic properties of and relations between objects. Perception is a two-step process involving the initial apprehension of the object and then the subsequent apperception/awareness that results in mental and syntactic/linguistic representations of the first moment of awareness. Here, linguistic categories originate in the different substances and attributes that exist in the world. Bhartrihari counters them by arguing that the act of perception, rather than acquiring linguistic clothing after the bare particular has already been presented to consciousness, can only be aware of the object before it as a 'this’ or ‘that’, that is, as an awareness of something only as a particular and as such, identifiable. That is to say, significantly enough, that for Bhartrihari, the word makes the thing an individual, and as one moves further and further along the refined categories of what is conventionally known as denotation, the word makes the thing what it is. For Bhartrihari, the difference the Logicians posit between the ontological and the linguistic would make meanings of all kinds, mundane ones and religious ones, contingent on the circumstances and speaker. But if perception is innately verbal, no perilous bridge need be suspended over some supposed abyss between vision and truth, both in our mundane lives and for the rishis who pronounced the Vedas. The word then makes the thing, and Brahman makes the world, and so it is entirely proper to speak of words as the creator of all things (shabda-Brahman).

7. Bhartrihari and Western Philosophy

Although previous Bhartrihari scholarship has progressed rather slowly due to numerous difficulties, within the last decade or so his work has garnered attention from Western scholars. Bhartrihari's explorations into the relations between language, thought and reality reflect contemporary philosophical concerns with meaning, language use, and communication, particularly in the work of Chomsky, Wittgenstein, Grice, and Austin. His theory of language recognizes that meaning is conveyed in formalist terms where meaning is organized along syntactical rules. But it makes the leap, not made by modern Western philosophers, that such a view of language does not merely serve our mundane communicative purposes and see to the achievement of practical goals, but leads to paramount metaphysical knowledge, a knowledge carrying with it a palpable salvific value.

8. References and Further Reading

  • Bhartrihari. The Vâkyapadîya, Critical texts of Cantos I and II with English Translation. Trans. K. Pillai. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass, 1971.
  • Coward, Harold G. The Sphota Theory of Language: A Philosophical Analysis . Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass, 1980.
  • Coward, Harold G., and K. Kunjunni Raja, eds. The Philosophy of the Grammarians (Volume V of Encyclopedia of Indian Philosophies, ed. Karl Potter). Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1990.
  • Herzberger, Radhika. Bhartrihari and the Buddhists. Dordrecht: D. Reidel/Kluwer Academic Publishers, 1986.
  • Houben, Jan E.M. The Sambanda Samuddesha and Bhartrihari's Philosophy of Language. Groningen: Egbert Forsten, 1995.
  • Iyer, Soubramania, K.A. Bhartrihari. A Study of Vâkyapadîya in the Light of Ancient Commentaries. Poona: Deccan College Postgraduate Research Institute, 1997.
  • Matilal, B.K. Mind, Language, and World. Ed. J. Ganeri. Delhi: Oxford University Press, 2002. (See "What Bhartrihari Would Have Said About Quine.")
  • Matilal, B.K. The Word and the World: India's Contribution to the Study of Language. Delhi: Oxford University Press, 1992.
  • Matilal, B. K. Perception: An Essay on Classical Indian Theories of Knowledge. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1986. (See chapter 12.)
  • Matilal, B.K. Epistemology, Logic, and Grammar in Indian Philosophical Analysis. The Hague: Mouton, 1971.
  • Potter, Karl, ed. The Tradition of the Nyâya-Vaisheshika up to Gangesha (Volume II of Encyclopedia of Indian Philosophies, ed. Karl Potter). Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass, 1977.
  • Shah, K.J. "Bhartrihari and Wittgenstein." Perspectives on the Philosophy of Meaning 1/1 (1990): 80-95.

Author Information

Stephanie Theodorou
Immaculata University
U. S. A.

Confucius (551—479 B.C.E.)

confuciusBetter known in China as "Master Kong" (Chinese: Kongzi), Confucius was a fifth-century BCE Chinese thinker whose influence upon East Asian intellectual and social history is immeasurable. As a culturally symbolic figure, he has been alternately idealized, deified, dismissed, vilified, and rehabilitated over the millennia by both Asian and non-Asian thinkers and regimes. Given his extraordinary impact on Chinese, Korean, Japanese, and Vietnamese thought, it is ironic that so little can be known about Confucius. The tradition that bears his name - "Confucianism" (Chinese: Rujia) - ultimately traces itself to the sayings and biographical fragments recorded in the text known as the Analects (Chinese: Lunyu). As with the person of Confucius himself, scholars disagree about the origins and character of the Analects, but it remains the traditional source for information about Confucius' life and teaching. Most scholars remain confident that it is possible to extract from the Analects several philosophical themes and views that may be safely attributed to this ancient Chinese sage. These are primarily ethical, rather than analytical-logical or metaphysical in nature, and include Confucius' claim that Tian ("Heaven") is aligned with moral order but dependent upon human agents to actualize its will; his concern for li (ritual propriety) as the instrument through which the family, the state, and the world may be aligned with Tian's moral order; and his belief in the "contagious" nature of moral force (de), by which moral rulers diffuse morality to their subjects, moral parents raise moral children, and so forth.

Table of Contents

  1. The Confucius of History
  2. The Confucius of the Analects
  3. Theodicy
  4. Harmonious order
  5. Moral force
  6. Self-cultivation
  7. The Confucius of Myth
  8. The Confucius of the State
  9. Key Interpreters of Confucius
  10. References and Further Reading

1. The Confucius of History

Sources for the historical recovery of Confucius' life and thought are limited to texts that postdate his traditional lifetime (551-479 BCE) by a few decades at least and several centuries at most. Confucius' appearances in Chinese texts are a sign of his popularity and utility among literate elites during the Warring States (403-221 BCE), Qin (221-206 BCE), and Han (206 BCE-220 CE) periods. These texts vary in character and function, from collections of biographical and pedagogical fragments such as the Analects to dynastic histories and works by later Confucian thinkers.

The historical Confucius, born in the small state of Lu on the Shandong peninsula in northeastern China, was a product of the "Spring and Autumn Period" (770-481 BCE). We know him mostly from texts that date to the "Warring States Period" (403-221 BCE). During these eras, China enjoyed no political unity and suffered from the internecine warfare of small states, remnants of the once-great Zhou polity that collapsed after "barbarian" invasions in 771 BCE. For more than three hundred years after the alleged year of Confucius' birth, the Chinese would fight each other for mastery of the empire lost by the Zhou. In the process, life became difficult, especially for the shi ("retainer" or “knight”) class, from which Confucius himself arose. As feudal lords were defeated and disenfranchised in battle and the kings of the various warring states began to rely on appointed administrators rather than vassals to govern their territories, these shi became lordless anachronisms and fell into genteel poverty and itinerancy. Their knowledge of aristocratic traditions, however, helped them remain valuable to competing kings, who wished to learn how to regain the unity imposed by the Zhou and who sought to emulate the Zhou by patterning court rituals and other institutions after those of the fallen dynasty.

Thus, a new role for shi as itinerant antiquarians emerged. In such roles, shi found themselves in and out of office as the fortunes of various patron states ebbed and flowed. Confucius is said to have held office for only a short time before withdrawing into scholarly retirement. While out of office, veteran shi might gather small circles of disciples - young men from shi backgrounds who wished to succeed in public life. It is precisely such master-and-disciple exchanges between Confucius and his students that the Analects claims to record.

2. The Confucius of the Analects

Above all else, the Analects depicts Confucius as someone who "transmits, but does not innovate" (7.1). What Confucius claimed to transmit was the Dao (Way) of the sages of Zhou antiquity; in the Analects, he is the erudite guardian of tradition who challenges his disciples to emulate the sages of the past and restore the moral integrity of the state. Although readers of the Analects often assume that Confucius' views are presented as a coherent and consistent system within the text, a careful reading reveals several different sets of philosophical concerns which do not conflict so much as they complement one another. These complimentary sets of concerns can be categorized into four groups:

  • Theodicy
  • Harmonious order
  • Moral force
  • Self-cultivation

3. Theodicy

Those familiar with Enlightenment-influenced presentations of Confucius as an austere humanist who did not discuss the supernatural may be surprised to encounter the term "theodicy" as a framework for understanding Confucius' philosophical concerns. Confucius’ record of silence on the subject of the divine is attested by the Analects (5.3, 7.21, 11.12). In fact, as a child of the late Zhou world, Confucius inherited a great many religious sensibilities, including theistic ones. For the early Chinese (c. 16th century BCE), the world was controlled by an all-powerful deity, "The Lord on High" (Shangdi), to whom entreaties were made in the first known Chinese texts, inscriptions found on animal bones offered in divinatory sacrifice. As the Zhou polity emerged and triumphed over the previous Shang tribal rule, Zhou apologists began to regard their deity, Tian ("Sky" or “Heaven”) as synonymous with Shangdi, the deity of the deposed Shang kings, and explained the decline of Shang and the rise of Zhou as a consequence of a change in Tianming ("the mandate of Heaven"). Thus, theistic justifications for conquest and rulership were present very early in Chinese history.By the time of Confucius, the concept of Tian appears to have changed slightly. For one thing, the ritual complex of Zhou diviners, which served to ascertain the will of Tian for the benefit of the king, had collapsed with Zhou rule itself. At the same time, the network of religious obligations to manifold divinities, local spirits, and ancestors does not seem to have ceased with the fall of the Zhou, and Confucius appears to uphold sacrifices to "gods and ghosts" as consistent with “transmitting” noble tradition. Yet, in the Analects, a new aspect of Tian emerges. For the Confucius of the Analects, discerning the will of Tian and reconciling it with his own moral compass sometimes proves to be a troubling exercise:

If Heaven is about to abandon this culture, those who die afterwards will not get to share in it; if Heaven has not yet abandoned this culture, what can the men of Guang [Confucius' adversaries in this instance] do to me? (9.5)

There is no one who recognizes me…. I neither resent Heaven nor blame humanity. In learning about the lower I have understood the higher. The one who recognizes me - wouldn't that be Heaven? (14.35)

Heaven has abandoned me! Heaven has abandoned me! (11.9)

As A. C. Graham has noted, Confucius seems to be of two minds about Tian. At times, he is convinced that he enjoys the personal protection and sanction of Tian, and thus defies his mortal opponents as he wages his campaign of moral instruction and reform. At other moments, however, he seems caught in the throes of existential despair, wondering if he has lost his divine backer at last. Tian seems to participate in functions of "fate" and “nature” as well as those of “deity.” What remains consistent throughout Confucius' discourses on Tian is his threefold assumption about this extrahuman, absolute power in the universe: (1) its alignment with moral goodness, (2) its dependence on human agents to actualize its will, and (3) the variable, unpredictable nature of its associations with mortal actors. Thus, to the extent that the Confucius of the Analects is concerned with justifying the ways of Tian to humanity, he tends to do so without questioning these three assumptions about the nature of Tian, which are rooted deeply in the Chinese past.

4. Harmonious order

The dependence of Tian upon human agents to put its will into practice helps account for Confucius' insistence on moral, political, social, and even religious activism. In one passage (17.19), Confucius seems to believe that, just as Tian does not speak but yet accomplishes its will for the cosmos, so too can he remain "silent" (in the sense of being out of office, perhaps) and yet effective in promoting his principles, possibly through the many disciples he trained for government service. At any rate, much of Confucius' teaching is directed toward the maintenance of three interlocking kinds of order: (1) aesthetic, (2) moral, and (3) social. The instrument for effecting and emulating all three is li (ritual propriety).

Do not look at, do not listen to, do not speak of, do not do whatever is contrary to ritual propriety. (12.1)

In this passage, Confucius underscores the crucial importance of rigorous attention to li as a kind of self-replicating blueprint for good manners and taste, morality, and social order. In his view, the appropriate use of a quotation from the Classic of Poetry (Shijing), the perfect execution of guest-host etiquette, and the correct performance of court ritual all serve a common end: they regulate and maintain order. The nature of this order is, as mentioned above, threefold. It is aesthetic -- quoting the Shijing upholds the cultural hegemony of Zhou literature and the conventions of elite good taste. Moreover, it is moral -- good manners demonstrate both concern for others and a sense of one's place. Finally, it is social -- rituals properly performed duplicate ideal hierarchies of power, whether between ruler and subject, parent and child, or husband and wife. For Confucius, the paramount example of harmonious social order seems to be xiao (filial piety), of which jing (reverence) is the key quality:

Observe what a person has in mind to do when his father is alive, and then observe what he does when his father is dead. If, for three years, he makes no changes to his father's ways, he can be said to be a good son. (1.11)

[The disciple] Ziyu asked about filial piety. The Master said, "Nowadays, for a person to be filial means no more than that he is able to provide his parents with food. Even dogs and horses are provided with food. If a person shows no reverence, where is the difference?" (2.7)

In serving your father and mother, you ought to dissuade them from doing wrong in the gentlest way. If you see your advice being ignored, you should not become disobedient but should remain reverent. You should not complain even if you are distressed. (4.18)

The character of this threefold order is deeper than mere conventions such as taste and decorum, as the above quotations demonstrate. Labeling it "aesthetic" might appear to demean or trivialize it, but to draw this conclusion is to fail to reflect on the peculiar way in which many Western thinkers tend to devalue the aesthetic. As David Hall and Roger Ames have argued, this "aesthetic" Confucian order is understood to be both intrinsically moral and profoundly harmonious, whether for a shi household, the court of a Warring States king, or the cosmos at large. When persons and things are in their proper places - and here tradition is the measure of propriety – relations are smooth, operations are effortless, and the good is sought and done voluntarily. In the hierarchical political and social conception of Confucius (and all of his Chinese contemporaries), what is below takes its cues from what is above. A moral ruler will diffuse morality to those under his sway; a moral parent will raise a moral child:

Let the ruler be a ruler, the subject a subject, a father a father, and a son a son. (12.11)

Direct the people with moral force and regulate them with ritual, and they will possess shame, and moreover, they will be righteous. (2.3)

5. Moral force

The last quotation from the Analects introduces a term perhaps most famously associated with a very different early Chinese text, the Laozi (Lao-tzu) or Daodejing (Tao Te Ching) - de (te), "moral force." Like Tian, de is heavily freighted with a long train of cultural and religious baggage, extending far back into the mists of early Chinese history. During the early Zhou period, de seems to have been a kind of amoral, almost magical power attributed to various persons - seductive women, charismatic leaders, etc. For Confucius, de seems to be just as magically efficacious, but stringently moral. It is both a quality, and a virtue of, the successful ruler:

One who rules by moral force may be compared to the North Star - it occupies its place and all the stars pay homage to it. (2.1)

De is a quality of the successful ruler, because he rules at the pleasure of Tian, which for Confucius is resolutely allied with morality, and to which he attributes his own inner de (7.23). De is the virtue of the successful ruler, without which he could not rule at all.

Confucius' vision of order unites aesthetic concerns for harmony and symmetry (li) with moral force (de) in pursuit of social goals: a well-ordered family, a well-ordered state, and a well-ordered world. Such an aesthetic, moral, and social program begins at home, with the cultivation of the individual.

6. Self-Cultivation

In the Analects, two types of persons are opposed to one another - not in terms of basic potential (for, in 17.2, Confucius says all human beings are alike at birth), but in terms of developed potential. These are the junzi (literally, "lord's son" or “gentleman”; Tu Wei-ming has originated the useful translation "profound person," which will be used here) and the xiaoren ("small person"):

The profound person understands what is moral. The small person understands what is profitable. (4.16)

The junzi is the person who always manifests the quality of ren (jen) in his person and the displays the quality of yi (i) in his actions (4.5). The character for ren is composed of two graphic elements, one representing a human being and the other representing the number two. Based on this, one often hears that ren means "how two people should treat one another." While such folk etymologies are common in discussions of Chinese characters, they often are as misleading as they are entertaining. In the case of ren - usually translated as "benevolence" or "humaneness" - the graphic elements of a human being and the number two really are instructive, so much so that Peter Boodberg suggested an evocative translation of ren as "co-humanity." The way in which the junzi relates to his fellow human beings, however, highlights Confucius' fundamentally hierarchical model of relations:

The moral force of the profound person is like the wind; the moral force of the small person is like the grass. Let the wind blow over the grass and it is sure to bend. (12.19)

D. C. Lau has pointed out that ren is an attribute of agents, while yi (literally, "what is fitting" -- “rightness,” "righteousness") is an attribute of actions. This helps to make clear the conceptual links between li, de, and the junzi. The junzi qua junzi exerts de, moral force, according to what is yi, fitting (that is, what is aesthetically, morally, and socially proper), and thus manifests ren, or the virtue of co-humanity in an interdependent, hierarchical universe over which Tian presides.

Two passages from the Analects go a long way in indicating the path toward self-cultivation that Confucius taught would-be junzi in fifth century BCE China:

From the age of fifteen on, I have been intent upon learning; from thirty on, I have established myself; from forty on, I have not been confused; from fifty on, I have known the mandate of Heaven; from sixty on, my ear has been attuned; from seventy on, I have followed my heart's desire without transgressing what is right. (2.4)

The Master's Way is nothing but other-regard and self-reflection. (4.15)

The first passage illustrates the gradual and long-term scale of the process of self-cultivation. It begins during one's teenaged years, and extends well into old age; it proceeds incrementally from intention (zhi) to learning (xue), from knowing the mandate of Heaven (Tianming) to doing both what is desired (yu) and what is right (yi). In his disciple Zengzi (Tseng-tzu)'s summary of his "Way" (Dao), Confucius teaches only "other-regard" (zhong) and “self-reflection” (shu). These terms merit their own discussion.

The conventional meaning of "other-regard" (zhong) in classical Chinese is "loyalty," especially loyalty to a ruler on the part of a minister. In the Analects, Confucius extends the meaning of the term to include exercising oneself to the fullest in all relationships, including relationships with those below oneself as well as with one's betters. "Self-reflection" (shu) is explained by Confucius as a negatively-phrased version of the "Golden Rule": “What you do not desire for yourself, do not do to others.” (15.24) When one reflects upon oneself, one realizes the necessity of concern for others. The self as conceptualized by Confucius is a deeply relational self that responds to inner reflection with outer virtue.

Similarly, the self that Confucius wishes to cultivate in his own person and in his disciples is one that looks within and compares itself with the aesthetic, moral, and social canons of tradition. Aware of its source in Tian, it seeks to maximize ren through apprenticeship to li so as to exercise de in a manner befitting a junzi. Because Confucius (and early Chinese thought in general) does not suffer from the Cartesian "mind-body problem" (as Herbert Fingarette has demonstrated), there is no dichotomy between inner and outer, self and whole, and thus the cumulative effect of Confucian self-cultivation is not merely personal, but collectively social and even cosmic.

7. The Confucius of Myth

While the Analects is valuable, albeit not infallible, as a source for the reconstruction of Confucius' thought, it is far from being the only text to which Chinese readers have turned in their quest for discovering his identity. During the Han dynasty (206 BCE-220 CE), numerous hagiographical accounts of Confucius' origins and deeds were produced, many of which would startle readers familiar only with the Analects. According to various texts, Confucius was a superhuman figure destined to rule as the "uncrowned king" of pre-imperial China. At birth, his body was said to have displayed special markings indicating his exemplary status. After his death, he was alleged to have revealed himself in a glorified state to his living disciples, who then received further esoteric teachings from their apotheosized master. Eventually, and perhaps inevitably, he was recognized as a deity and a cult organized itself around his worship. Feng Youlan has suggested that, had these Han images of Confucius prevailed, Confucius would have become a figure comparable to Jesus Christ in the history of China, and there would have been no arguments among scholars about whether or not Confucianism was a religion like Christianity.

To both ancient modern eyes, fantastic and improbable myths of Confucius should be added more recent myths about the sage that date from the earliest sustained contact between China and the West during the early modern period. The Latinization of Kong(fu)zi to "Confucius" originates with the interpretation of Chinese culture and thought by Jesuit missionaries for their Western audiences, supporters, and critics. Jesuits steeped in Renaissance humanism saw in Confucius a Renaissance humanist; German thinkers such as Leibniz or Wolff recognized in him an Enlightenment sage. Hegel condemned Confucius for exemplifying those whom he saw as "the people without history"; Mao castigated Confucius for imprisoning China in a cage of feudal archaism and oppression. Each remade Confucius in his own image for his own ends - a process that continues throughout the modern era, creating great heat and little light where the historical Confucius himself is concerned. Each mythologizer has seen Confucius as a symbol of whatever s/he loves or hates about China. As H. G. Creel once put it, once a figure like Confucius has become a cultural hero, stories about him tell us more about the values of the storytellers than about Confucius himself.

8. The Confucius of the State

Such mythmaking was very important to the emerging imperial Chinese state, however, as it struggled to impose cultural unity on a vast and fractious territory during the final few centuries BCE and beyond into the Common Era. After the initial persecution of Confucians during the short-lived Qin dynasty (221-202 BCE), the succeeding Han emperors and their ministers seized upon Confucius as a vehicle for the legitimation of their rule and the social control of their subjects. The "Five Classics" - five ancient texts associated with Confucius - were established as the basis for the imperial civil service examinations in 136 BCE, making memorization of these texts and their orthodox Confucian interpretations mandatory for all who wished to obtain official positions in the Han government. The state's love affair with Confucius carried on through the end of the Han in 220 CE, after which Confucius fell out of official favor as a series of warring factions struggled for control of China during the "Period of Disunity" (220-589 CE) and foreign and indigenous religious traditions such as Buddhism and Daoism rivaled Confucianism for the attentions of the elite.

After the restoration of unified imperial government with the Tang dynasty (618-907 CE), however, the future of Confucius as a symbol of the Chinese cultural and political establishment became increasingly secure. State-sponsored sacrifices to him formed part of the official religious complex of temple rituals, from the national to the local level, and orthodox hagiography and history cemented his reputation as cultural hero among the masses. The Song dynasty (969-1279 CE) Confucian scholar Zhu Xi (Chu Hsi, 1130-1200 CE) institutionalized the study of the Analects as one of "Four Books" required for the redesigned imperial civil service examinations, and aspiring officials continued to memorize the text and orthodox commentaries on it until the early twentieth century.

With the fall of the last Chinese imperial government in 1911, Confucius also fell from his position of state-imposed grandeur - but not for long. Within a short time of the abdication of the last emperor, monarchists were plotting to restore a Confucian ruler to the throne. Although these plans did not materialize, the Nationalist regime in mainland China and later in Taiwan has promoted Confucius and Confucianism in a variety of ways in order to distinguish itself from the iconoclastic Communists who followed Mao to victory and control over most of China in 1949. Even the Communist regime in China has bowed reverentially to Confucius on occasion, although not without vilifying him first, especially during the anti-traditional "Cultural Revolution" campaigns of the late 1960s and early 1970s.

Today, the Communist government of China spends a great deal of money on the reconstruction and restoration of old imperial temples to Confucius across the country, and has even erected many new statues of Confucius in areas likely to be frequented by tourists from overseas. Predictably, Confucius, as a philosopher, has been rehabilitated by culturally Chinese regimes across Asia, from Singapore to Beijing, as what Wm. Th. de Bary has called "the East Asian challenge for human rights" has prompted attempts to ground "human rights with Chinese characteristics" in an authentically traditional source. In short, Confucius seems far from dead, although one wonders if the authentic spirit of his fifth century BCE thought ever will live again.

9. Key Interpreters of Confucius

Detailed discussion of Confucius' key interpreters is best reserved for an article on Confucian philosophy. Nonetheless, an outline of the most important commentators and their philosophical trajectories is worth including here.

The two best known early interpreters of Confucius' thought - besides the compilers of the Analects themselves, who worked gradually from the time of Confucius' death until sometime during the former Han dynasty - are the Warring States philosophers "Mencius" or Mengzi (Meng-tzu, 372-289 BCE) and Xunzi (Hsun-tzu, 310-220 BCE). Neither knew Confucius personally, nor did they know one another, except retrospectively, as in the case of Xunzi commenting on Mencius. The two usually are cast as being opposed to one another because of their disagreement over human nature - a subject on which Confucius was notably silent (Analects 5.13).

Mencius illustrates a pattern typical of Confucius' interpreters in that he claims to be doing nothing more than "transmitting" Confucius' thought while introducing new ideas of his own. For Mencius, renxing (human nature) is congenitally disposed toward ren, but requires cultivation through li as well as yogic disciplines related to one's qi (vital energy), and may be stunted (although never destroyed) through neglect or negative environmental influence. Confucius does not use the term renxing in the Analects, nor does he describe qi in Mencius' sense, and nowhere does he provide an account of the basic goodness of human beings. Nonetheless, it is Mencius' interpretation of Confucius’ thought - especially after the ascendancy of Zhu Xi's brand of Confucianism in the twelfth century CE - that became regarded as orthodox by most Chinese thinkers.

Like Mencius, Xunzi claims to interpret Confucius' thought authentically, but leavens it with his own contributions. Whereas Mencius claims that human beings are originally good but argues for the necessity of self-cultivation, Xunzi claims that human beings are originally bad but argues that they can be reformed, even perfected, through self-cultivation. Also like Mencius, Xunzi sees li as the key to the cultivation of renxing. Although Xunzi condemns Mencius' arguments in no uncertain terms, when one has risen above the smoke and din of the fray, one may see that the two thinkers share many assumptions, including one that links each to Confucius: the assumption that human beings can be transformed by participation in traditional aesthetic, moral, and social disciplines.

Later interpreters of Confucius' thought between the Tang and Ming dynasties are often grouped together under the label of "Neo-Confucianism." This term has no cognate in classical Chinese, but is useful insofar as it unites several thinkers from disparate eras who share common themes and concerns. Thinkers such as Zhang Zai (Chang Tsai, 1020-1077 CE), Zhu Xi (Chu Hsi, 1130-1200 CE), and Wang Yangming (1472-1529 CE), while distinct from one another, agree on the primacy of Confucius as the fountainhead of the Confucian tradition, share Mencius' understanding of human beings as innately good, and revere the "Five Classics" and “Four Books” associated with Confucius as authoritative sources for standards of ritual, moral, and social propriety. These thinkers also display a bent toward the cosmological and metaphysical which isolates them from the Confucius of the Analects, and betrays the influence of Buddhism and Daoism - two movements with little or no popular following in Confucius' China -- on their thought.

This cursory review of some seminal interpreters of Confucius' thought illustrates a principle that ought to be followed by all who seek to understanding Confucius' philosophical views: suspicion of the sources. All sources for reconstructing Confucius' views, from the Analects on down, postdate the master and come from a hand other than his own, and thus all should be used with caution and with an eye toward possible influences from outside of fifth century BCE China.

10. References and Further Reading

  • Allan, Sarah. The Way of Water and Sprouts of Virtue. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1997.
  • Allinson, Robert E. "The Golden Rule as the Core Value in Confucianism and Christianity: Ethical Similarities and Differences." Asian Philosophy 2/2 (1992): 173-185.
  • Ames, Roger T., and Henry Rosemont, Jr., trans. The Analects of Confucius: A Philosophical Translation. New York: Ballatine, 1998.
  • Ames, Roger T. "The Focus-Field Self in Classical Confucianism," in Self as Person in Asian Theory and Practice, ed. Roger T. Ames (Albany: State University of New York Press, 1994), 187-212.
  • Berthrong, John. "Trends in the Interpretation of Confucian Religiosity," in The Confucian-Christian Encounter in Historical and Contemporary Perspective, ed. Peter K. H. Lee (Lewiston, ME: Edwin Mellen Press, 1991), 226-254.
  • Boodberg, Peter A. "The Semasiology of Some Primary Confucian Concepts," in Selected Works of Peter A. Boodberg, ed. Alvin P. Cohen (Berkeley: University of California Press, 1979), 26-40.
  • Brooks, E. Bruce and A. Taeko, trans. The Original Analects: Sayings of Confucius and His Successors. New York: Columbia University Press, 1998.
  • Chan, Wing-tsit, ed. A Sourcebook in Chinese Philosophy. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1963.
  • Cheng, Anne. "Lun-yü," in Early Chinese Texts: A Bibliographical Guide, ed. Michael Loewe (Berkeley: Society for the Study of Early China and the Institute of East Asian Studies, University of California, Berkeley, 1993), 313-323.
  • Creel, Herrlee G. Confucius and the Chinese Way. New York: Harper and Row, 1949.
  • Creel, Herrlee G. "Was Confucius Agnostic?" T'oung Pao 29 (1935): 55-99.
  • Csikszentmihalyi, Mark. "Confucius and the Analects in the Hàn," in Confucius and the Analects: New Essays, ed. Bryan W. Van Norden (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2002), 134-162.
  • Eno, Robert. The Confucian Creation of Heaven. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1990.
  • Fingarette, Herbert. Confucius -- The Secular as Sacred. New York: Harper Torchbooks, 1972.
  • Graham, A. C. Disputers of the Tao: Philosophical Argument in Ancient China. La Salle, IL: Open Court, 1989.
  • Hall, David L., and Roger T. Ames. Thinking Through Confucius. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1987.
  • Ivanhoe, Philip J. "Whose Confucius? Which Analects?" in Confucius and the Analects: New Essays, ed. Bryan W. Van Norden (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2002), 119-133.
  • Lau, D.C., trans. Confucius -- The Analects. 2nd ed. Hong Kong: Chinese University Press, 1992.
  • Legge, James, trans. Confucius -- Confucian Analects, The Great Learning, and the Doctrine of the Mean. New York: Dover Publications, 1971.
  • Munro, Donald J. The Concept of Man In Early China. Stanford, CA: Stanford University Press, 1969.
  • Nivison, David S. "The Classical Philosophical Writings," in The Cambridge History of Ancient China: From the Origins of Civilization to 221 B.C., ed. Michael Loewe and Edward L. Shaughnessy (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1999), 745-812.
  • Nivison, David S. The Ways of Confucianism: Investigations in Chinese Philosophy. Ed. Bryan W. Van Norden. Chicago and La Salle, IL: Open Court, 1996.
  • Schwartz, Benjamin I. The World of Thought in Ancient China. Cambridge, MA: The Belknap Press of Harvard University Press, 1985.
  • Shryock, John K. The Origin and Development of the State Cult of Confucius. New York: Century Company, 1932.
  • Taylor, Rodney L. "The Religious Character of the Confucian Tradition." Philosophy East and West 48/1 (January 1998): 80-107.
  • Tu, Wei-ming. "Li as a Process of Humanization," in Tu, Humanity and Self-Cultivation: Essays in Confucian Thought (Berkeley: Asian Humanities Press, 1979), 17-34.
  • Van Norden, Bryan W. "Introduction," in Confucius and the Analects: New Essays, ed. Bryan W. Van Norden (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2002), 3-38.
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Author Information

Jeff Richey
Berea College
U. S. A.

John Dewey (1859—1952)

deweyJohn Dewey was a leading proponent of the American school of thought known as pragmatism, a view that rejected the dualistic epistemology and metaphysics of modern philosophy in favor of a naturalistic approach that viewed knowledge as arising from an active adaptation of the human organism to its environment. On this view, inquiry should not be understood as consisting of a mind passively observing the world and drawing from this ideas that if true correspond to reality, but rather as a process which initiates with a check or obstacle to successful human action, proceeds to active manipulation of the environment to test hypotheses, and issues in a re-adaptation of organism to environment that allows once again for human action to proceed. With this view as his starting point, Dewey developed a broad body of work encompassing virtually all of the main areas of philosophical concern in his day. He also wrote extensively on social issues in such popular publications as the New Republic, thereby gaining a reputation as a leading social commentator of his time.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Works
  2. Theory of Knowledge
  3. Metaphysics
  4. Ethical and Social Theory
  5. Aesthetics
  6. Critical Reception and Influence
  7. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Life and Works

John Dewey was born on October 20, 1859, the third of four sons born to Archibald Sprague Dewey and Lucina Artemesia Rich of Burlington, Vermont. The eldest sibling died in infancy, but the three surviving brothers attended the public school and the University of Vermont in Burlington with John. While at the University of Vermont, Dewey was exposed to evolutionary theory through the teaching of G.H. Perkins and Lessons in Elementary Physiology, a text by T.H. Huxley, the famous English evolutionist. The theory of natural selection continued to have a life-long impact upon Dewey's thought, suggesting the barrenness of static models of nature, and the importance of focusing on the interaction between the human organism and its environment when considering questions of psychology and the theory of knowledge. The formal teaching in philosophy at the University of Vermont was confined for the most part to the school of Scottish realism, a school of thought that Dewey soon rejected, but his close contact both before and after graduation with his teacher of philosophy, H.A.P. Torrey, a learned scholar with broader philosophical interests and sympathies, was later accounted by Dewey himself as "decisive" to his philosophical development.

After graduation in 1879, Dewey taught high school for two years, during which the idea of pursuing a career in philosophy took hold. With this nascent ambition in mind, he sent a philosophical essay to W.T. Harris, then editor of the Journal of Speculative Philosophy, and the most prominent of the St. Louis Hegelians. Harris's acceptance of the essay gave Dewey the confirmation he needed of his promise as a philosopher. With this encouragement he traveled to Baltimore to enroll as a graduate student at Johns Hopkins University.

At Johns Hopkins Dewey came under the tutelage of two powerful and engaging intellects who were to have a lasting influence on him. George Sylvester Morris, a German-trained Hegelian philosopher, exposed Dewey to the organic model of nature characteristic of German idealism. G. Stanley Hall, one of the most prominent American experimental psychologists at the time, provided Dewey with an appreciation of the power of scientific methodology as applied to the human sciences. The confluence of these viewpoints propelled Dewey's early thought, and established the general tenor of his ideas throughout his philosophical career.

Upon obtaining his doctorate in 1884, Dewey accepted a teaching post at the University of Michigan, a post he was to hold for ten years, with the exception of a year at the University of Minnesota in 1888. While at Michigan Dewey wrote his first two books: Psychology (1887), and Leibniz's New Essays Concerning the Human Understanding (1888). Both works expressed Dewey's early commitment to Hegelian idealism, while the Psychology explored the synthesis between this idealism and experimental science that Dewey was then attempting to effect. At Michigan Dewey also met one of his important philosophical collaborators, James Hayden Tufts, with whom he would later author Ethics (1908; revised ed. 1932).

In 1894, Dewey followed Tufts to the recently founded University of Chicago. It was during his years at Chicago that Dewey's early idealism gave way to an empirically based theory of knowledge that was in concert with the then developing American school of thought known as pragmatism. This change in view finally coalesced into a series of four essays entitled collectively "Thought and its Subject-Matter," which was published along with a number of other essays by Dewey's colleagues and students at Chicago under the title Studies in Logical Theory (1903). Dewey also founded and directed a laboratory school at Chicago, where he was afforded an opportunity to apply directly his developing ideas on pedagogical method. This experience provided the material for his first major work on education, The School and Society (1899).

Disagreements with the administration over the status of the Laboratory School led to Dewey's resignation from his post at Chicago in 1904. His philosophical reputation now secured, he was quickly invited to join the Department of Philosophy at Columbia University. Dewey spent the rest of his professional life at Columbia. Now in New York, located in the midst of the Northeastern universities that housed many of the brightest minds of American philosophy, Dewey developed close contacts with many philosophers working from divergent points of view, an intellectually stimulating atmosphere which served to nurture and enrich his thought.

During his first decade at Columbia Dewey wrote a great number of articles in the theory of knowledge and metaphysics, many of which were published in two important books: The Influence of Darwin on Philosophy and Other Essays in Contemporary Thought (1910) and Essays in Experimental Logic(1916). His interest in educational theory also continued during these years, fostered by his work at Teachers College at Columbia. This led to the publication of How We Think (1910; revised ed. 1933), an application of his theory of knowledge to education, and Democracy and Education (1916), perhaps his most important work in the field.

During his years at Columbia Dewey's reputation grew not only as a leading philosopher and educational theorist, but also in the public mind as an important commentator on contemporary issues, the latter due to his frequent contributions to popular magazines such as The New Republic and Nation, as well as his ongoing political involvement in a variety of causes, such as women's suffrage and the unionization of teachers. One outcome of this fame was numerous invitations to lecture in both academic and popular venues. Many of his most significant writings during these years were the result of such lectures, includingReconstruction in Philosophy (1920), Human Nature and Conduct (1922), Experience and Nature(1925), The Public and its Problems (1927), and The Quest for Certainty (1929).

Dewey's retirement from active teaching in 1930 did not curtail his activity either as a public figure or productive philosopher. Of special note in his public life was his participation in the Commission of Inquiry into the Charges Against Leon Trotsky at the Moscow Trial, which exposed Stalin's political machinations behind the Moscow trials of the mid-1930s, and his defense of fellow philosopher Bertrand Russell against an attempt by conservatives to remove him from his chair at the College of the City of New York in 1940. A primary focus of Dewey's philosophical pursuits during the 1930s was the preparation of a final formulation of his logical theory, published as Logic: The Theory of Inquiry in 1938. Dewey's other significant works during his retirement years include Art as Experience (1934), A Common Faith(1934), Freedom and Culture (1939), Theory of Valuation (1939), and Knowing and the Known(1949), the last coauthored with Arthur F. Bentley. Dewey continued to work vigorously throughout his retirement until his death on June 2, 1952, at the age of ninety-two.

2. Theory of Knowledge

The central focus of Dewey's philosophical interests throughout his career was what has been traditionally called "epistemology," or the "theory of knowledge." It is indicative, however, of Dewey's critical stance toward past efforts in this area that he expressly rejected the term "epistemology," preferring the "theory of inquiry" or "experimental logic" as more representative of his own approach.

In Dewey's view, traditional epistemologies, whether rationalist or empiricist, had drawn too stark a distinction between thought, the domain of knowledge, and the world of fact to which thought purportedly referred: thought was believed to exist apart from the world, epistemically as the object of immediate awareness, ontologically as the unique aspect of the self. The commitment of modern rationalism, stemming from Descartes, to a doctrine of innate ideas, ideas constituted from birth in the very nature of the mind itself, had effected this dichotomy; but the modern empiricists, beginning with Locke, had done the same just as markedly by their commitment to an introspective methodology and a representational theory of ideas. The resulting view makes a mystery of the relevance of thought to the world: if thought constitutes a domain that stands apart from the world, how can its accuracy as an account of the world ever be established? For Dewey a new model, rejecting traditional presumptions, was wanting, a model that Dewey endeavored to develop and refine throughout his years of writing and reflection.

In his early writings on these issues, such as "Is Logic a Dualistic Science?" (1890) and "The Present Position of Logical Theory" (1891), Dewey offered a solution to epistemological issues mainly along the lines of his early acceptance of Hegelian idealism: the world of fact does not stand apart from thought, but is itself defined within thought as its objective manifestation. But during the succeeding decade Dewey gradually came to reject this solution as confused and inadequate.

A number of influences have bearing on Dewey's change of view. For one, Hegelian idealism was not conducive to accommodating the methodologies and results of experimental science which he accepted and admired. Dewey himself had attempted to effect such an accommodation between experimental psychology and idealism in his early Psychology (1887), but the publication of William James' Principles of Psychology (1891), written from a more thoroughgoing naturalistic stance, suggested the superfluity of idealist principles in the treatment of the subject.

Second, Darwin's theory of natural selection suggested in a more particular way the form which a naturalistic approach to the theory of knowledge should take. Darwin's theory had renounced supernatural explanations of the origins of species by accounting for the morphology of living organisms as a product of a natural, temporal process of the adaptation of lineages of organisms to their environments, environments which, Darwin understood, were significantly determined by the organisms that occupied them. The key to the naturalistic account of species was a consideration of the complex interrelationships between organisms and environments. In a similar way, Dewey came to believe that a productive, naturalistic approach to the theory of knowledge must begin with a consideration of the development of knowledge as an adaptive human response to environing conditions aimed at an active restructuring of these conditions. Unlike traditional approaches in the theory of knowledge, which saw thought as a subjective primitive out of which knowledge was composed, Dewey's approach understood thought genetically, as the product of the interaction between organism and environment, and knowledge as having practical instrumentality in the guidance and control of that interaction. Thus Dewey adopted the term "instrumentalism" as a descriptive appellation for his new approach.

Dewey's first significant application of this new naturalistic understanding was offered in his seminal article "The Reflex Arc Concept in Psychology" (1896). In this article, Dewey argued that the dominant conception of the reflex arc in the psychology of his day, which was thought to begin with the passive stimulation of the organism, causing a conscious act of awareness eventuating in a response, was a carry-over of the old, and errant, mind-body dualism. Dewey argued for an alternative view: the organism interacts with the world through self-guided activity that coordinates and integrates sensory and motor responses. The implication for the theory of knowledge was clear: the world is not passively perceived and thereby known; active manipulation of the environment is involved integrally in the process of learning from the start.

Dewey first applied this interactive naturalism in an explicit manner to the theory of knowledge in his four introductory essays in Studies in Logical Theory. Dewey identified the view expressed in Studies with the school of pragmatism, crediting William James as its progenitor. James, for his part, in an article appearing in the Psychological Bulletin, proclaimed the work as the expression of a new school of thought, acknowledging its originality.

A detailed genetic analysis of the process of inquiry was Dewey's signal contribution to Studies. Dewey distinguished three phases of the process. It begins with the problematic situation, a situation where instinctive or habitual responses of the human organism to the environment are inadequate for the continuation of ongoing activity in pursuit of the fulfillment of needs and desires. Dewey stressed inStudies and subsequent writings that the uncertainty of the problematic situation is not inherently cognitive, but practical and existential. Cognitive elements enter into the process as a response to precognitive maladjustment.

The second phase of the process involves the isolation of the data or subject matter which defines the parameters within which the reconstruction of the initiating situation must be addressed. In the third, reflective phase of the process, the cognitive elements of inquiry (ideas, suppositions, theories, etc.) are entertained as hypothetical solutions to the originating impediment of the problematic situation, the implications of which are pursued in the abstract. The final test of the adequacy of these solutions comes with their employment in action. If a reconstruction of the antecedent situation conducive to fluid activity is achieved, then the solution no longer retains the character of the hypothetical that marks cognitive thought; rather, it becomes a part of the existential circumstances of human life.

The error of modern epistemologists, as Dewey saw it, was that they isolated the reflective stages of this process, and hypostatized the elements of those stages (sensations, ideas, etc.) into pre-existing constituents of a subjective mind in their search for an incorrigible foundation of knowledge. For Dewey, the hypostatization was as groundless as the search for incorrigibility was barren. Rejecting foundationalism, Dewey accepted the fallibilism that was characteristic of the school of pragmatism: the view that any proposition accepted as an item of knowledge has this status only provisionally, contingent upon its adequacy in providing a coherent understanding of the world as the basis for human action.

Dewey defended this general outline of the process of inquiry throughout his long career, insisting that it was the only proper way to understand the means by which we attain knowledge, whether it be the commonsense knowledge that guides the ordinary affairs of our lives, or the sophisticated knowledge arising from scientific inquiry. The latter is only distinguished from the former by the precision of its methods for controlling data, and the refinement of its hypotheses. In his writings in the theory of inquiry subsequent to Studies, Dewey endeavored to develop and deepen instrumentalism by considering a number of central issues of traditional epistemology from its perspective, and responding to some of the more trenchant criticisms of the view.

One traditional question that Dewey addressed in a series of essays between 1906 and 1909 was that of the meaning of truth. Dewey at that time considered the pragmatic theory of truth as central to the pragmatic school of thought, and vigorously defended its viability. Both Dewey and William James, in his book Pragmatism (1907), argued that the traditional correspondence theory of truth, according to which the true idea is one that agrees or corresponds to reality, only begs the question of what the "agreement" or "correspondence" of idea with reality is. Dewey and James maintained that an idea agrees with reality, and is therefore true, if and only if it is successfully employed in human action in pursuit of human goals and interests, that is, if it leads to the resolution of a problematic situation in Dewey's terms. The pragmatic theory of truth met with strong opposition among its critics, perhaps most notably from the British logician and philosopher Bertrand Russell. Dewey later began to suspect that the issues surrounding the conditions of truth, as well as knowledge, were hopelessly obscured by the accretion of traditional, and in his view misguided, meanings to the terms, resulting in confusing ambiguity. He later abandoned these terms in favor of "warranted assertiblity" to describe the distinctive property of ideas that results from successful inquiry.

One of the most important developments of his later writings in the theory of knowledge was the application of the principles of instrumentalism to the traditional conceptions and formal apparatus of logical theory. Dewey made significant headway in this endeavor in his lengthy introduction to Essays in Experimental Logic, but the project reached full fruition in Logic: The Theory of Inquiry.

The basis of Dewey's discussion in the Logic is the continuity of intelligent inquiry with the adaptive responses of pre-human organisms to their environments in circumstances that check efficient activity in the fulfillment of organic needs. What is distinctive about intelligent inquiry is that it is facilitated by the use of language, which allows, by its symbolic meanings and implication relationships, the hypothetical rehearsal of adaptive behaviors before their employment under actual, prevailing conditions for the purpose of resolving problematic situations. Logical form, the specialized subject matter of traditional logic, owes its genesis not to rational intuition, as had often been assumed by logicians, but due to its functional value in (1) managing factual evidence pertaining to the problematic situation that elicits inquiry, and (2) controlling the procedures involved in the conceptualized entertainment of hypothetical solutions. As Dewey puts it, "logical forms accrue to subject-matter when the latter is subjected to controlled inquiry."

From this new perspective, Dewey reconsiders many of the topics of traditional logic, such as the distinction between deductive and inductive inference, propositional form, and the nature of logical necessity. One important outcome of this work was a new theory of propositions. Traditional views in logic had held that the logical import of propositions is defined wholly by their syntactical form (e.g., "All As are Bs," "Some Bs are Cs"). In contrast, Dewey maintained that statements of identical propositional form can play significantly different functional roles in the process of inquiry. Thus in keeping with his distinction between the factual and conceptual elements of inquiry, he replaced the accepted distinctions between universal, particular, and singular propositions based on syntactical meaning with a distinction between existential and ideational propositions, a distinction that largely cuts across traditional classifications. The same general approach is taken throughout the work: the aim is to offer functional analyses of logical principles and techniques that exhibit their operative utility in the process of inquiry as Dewey understood it.

The breadth of topics treated and the depth and continuity of the discussion of these topics mark theLogic as Dewey's decisive statement in logical theory. The recognition of the work's importance within the philosophical community of the time can be gauged by the fact that the Journal of Philosophy, the most prominent American journal in the field, dedicated an entire issue to a discussion of the work, including contributions by such philosophical luminaries as C. I. Lewis of Harvard University, and Ernest Nagel, Dewey's colleague at Columbia University. Although many of his critics did question, and continue to question, the assumptions of his approach, one that is certainly unique in the development of twentieth century logical theory, there is no doubt that the work was and continues to be an important contribution to the field.

3. Metaphysics

Dewey's naturalistic metaphysics first took shape in articles that he wrote during the decade after the publication of Studies in Logical Theory, a period when he was attempting to elucidate the implications of instrumentalism. Dewey disagreed with William James's assessment that pragmatic principles were metaphysically neutral. (He discusses this disagreement in "What Does Pragmatism Mean by Practical," published in 1908.) Dewey's view was based in part on an assessment of the motivations behind traditional metaphysics: a central aim of the metaphysical tradition had been the discovery of an immutable cognitive object that could serve as a foundation for knowledge. The pragmatic theory, by showing that knowledge is a product of an activity directed to the fulfillment of human purposes, and that a true (or warranted) belief is known to be such by the consequences of its employment rather than by any psychological or ontological foundations, rendered this longstanding aim of metaphysics, in Dewey's view, moot, and opened the door to renewed metaphysical discussion grounded firmly on an empirical basis.

Dewey begins to define the general form that an empirical metaphysics should take in a number of articles, including "The Postulate of Immediate Empiricism" (1905) and "Does Reality Possess Practical Character?" (1908). In the former article, Dewey asserts that things experienced empirically "are what they are experienced as." Dewey uses as an example a noise heard in a darkened room that is initially experienced as fearsome. Subsequent inquiry (e.g., turning on the lights and looking about) reveals that the noise was caused by a shade tapping against a window, and thus innocuous. But the subsequent inquiry, Dewey argues, does not change the initial status of the noise: it was experienced as fearsome, and in fact was fearsome. The point stems from the naturalistic roots of Dewey's logic. Our experience of the world is constituted by our interrelationship with it, a relationship that is imbued with practical import. The initial fearsomeness of the noise is the experiential correlate of the uncertain, problematic character of the situation, an uncertainty that is not merely subjective or mental, but a product of the potential inadequacy of previously established modes of behavior to deal effectively with the pragmatic demands of present circumstances. The subsequent inquiry does not, therefore, uncover a reality (the innocuousness of the noise) underlying a mere appearance (its fearsomeness), but by settling the demands of the situation, it effects a change in the inter-dynamics of the organism-environment relationship of the initial situation--a change in reality.

There are two important implications of this line of thought that distinguish it from the metaphysical tradition. First, although inquiry is aimed at resolving the precarious and confusing aspects of experience to provide a stable basis for action, this does not imply the unreality of the unstable and contingent, nor justify its relegation to the status of mere appearance. Thus, for example, the usefulness and reliability of utilizing certain stable features of things encountered in our experience as a basis for classification does not justify according ultimate reality to essences or Platonic forms any more than, as rationalist metaphysicians in the modern era have thought, the similar usefulness of mathematical reasoning in understanding natural processes justifies the conclusion that the world can be exhaustively defined mathematically.

Second, the fact that the meanings we attribute to natural events might change in any particular in the future as renewed inquiries lead to more adequate understandings of natural events (as was implied by Dewey's fallibilism) does not entail that our experience of the world at any given time may as a whole be errant. Thus the implicit skepticism that underlies the representational theory of ideas and raises questions concerning the veracity of perceptual experience as such is unwarranted. Dewey stresses the point that sensations, hypotheses, ideas, etc., come into play to mediate our encounter with the world only in the context of active inquiry. Once inquiry is successful in resolving a problematic situation, mediatory sensations and ideas, as Dewey says, "drop out; and things are present to the agent in the most naively realistic fashion."

These contentions positioned Dewey's metaphysics within the territory of a naive realism, and in a number of his articles, such as "The Realism of Pragmatism" (1905), "Brief Studies in Realism" (1911), and "The Existence of the World as a Logical Problem" (1915), it is this view that Dewey expressly avows (a view that he carefully distinguishes from what he calls "presentational realism," which he attributes to a number of the other realists of his day). Opposing narrow-minded positions that would accord full ontological status only to certain, typically the most stable or reliable, aspects of experience, Dewey argues for a position that recognizes the real significance of the multifarious richness of human experience.

Dewey offered a fuller statement of his metaphysics in 1925, with the publication of one of his most significant philosophical works, Experience and Nature. In the introductory chapter, Dewey stresses a familiar theme from his earlier writings: that previous metaphysicians, guided by unavowed biases for those aspects of experience that are relatively stable and secure, have illicitly reified these biases into narrow ontological presumptions, such as the temporal identity of substance, or the ultimate reality of forms or essences. Dewey finds this procedure so pervasive in the history of thought that he calls it simplythe philosophic fallacy, and signals his intention to eschew the disastrous consequences of this approach by offering a descriptive account of all of the various generic features of human experience, whatever their character.

Dewey begins with the observation that the world as we experience it both individually and collectively is an admixture of the precarious, the transitory and contingent aspect of things, and the stable, the patterned regularity of natural processes that allows for prediction and human intervention. Honest metaphysical description must take into account both of these elements of experience. Dewey endeavors to do this by an event ontology. The world, rather than being comprised of things or, in more traditional terms, substances, is comprised of happenings or occurrences that admit of both episodic uniqueness and general, structured order. Intrinsically events have an ineffable qualitative character by which they are immediately enjoyed or suffered, thus providing the basis for experienced value and aesthetic appreciation. Extrinsically events are connected to one another by patterns of change and development; any given event arises out of determinant prior conditions and leads to probable consequences. The patterns of these temporal processes is the proper subject matter of human knowledge--we know the world in terms of causal laws and mathematical relationships--but the instrumental value of understanding and controlling them should not blind us to the immediate, qualitative aspect of events; indeed, the value of scientific understanding is most significantly realized in the facility it affords for controlling the circumstances under which immediate enjoyments may be realized.

It is in terms of the distinction between qualitative immediacy and the structured order of events that Dewey understands the general pattern of human life and action. This understanding is captured by James' suggestive metaphor that human experience consists of an alternation of flights and perchings, an alternation of concentrated effort directed toward the achievement of foreseen aims, what Dewey calls "ends-in-view," with the fruition of effort in the immediate satisfaction of "consummatory experience." Dewey's insistence that human life follows the patterns of nature, as a part of nature, is the core tenet of his naturalistic outlook.

Dewey also addresses the social aspect of human experience facilitated by symbolic activity, particularly that of language. For Dewey the question of the nature of social relationships is a significant matter not only for social theory, but metaphysics as well, for it is from collective human activity, and specifically the development of shared meanings that govern this activity, that the mind arises. Thus rather than understanding the mind as a primitive and individual human endowment, and a precondition of conscious and intentional action, as was typical in the philosophical tradition since Descartes, Dewey offers a genetic analysis of mind as an emerging aspect of cooperative activity mediated by linguistic communication. Consciousness, in turn, is not to be understood as a domain of private awareness, but rather as the fulcrum point of the organism's readjustment to the challenge of novel conditions where the meanings and attitudes that formulate habitual behavioral responses to the environment fail to be adequate. Thus Dewey offers in the better part of a number of chapters of Experience and Nature a response to the traditional mind-body problem of the metaphysical tradition, a response that understands the mind as an emergent issue of natural processes, more particularly the web of interactive relationships between human beings and the world in which they live.

4. Ethical and Social Theory

Dewey's mature thought in ethics and social theory is not only intimately linked to the theory of knowledge in its founding conceptual framework and naturalistic standpoint, but also complementary to it in its emphasis on the social dimension of inquiry both in its processes and its consequences. In fact, it would be reasonable to claim that Dewey's theory of inquiry cannot be fully understood either in the meaning of its central tenets or the significance of its originality without considering how it applies to social aims and values, the central concern of his ethical and social theory.

Dewey rejected the atomistic understanding of society of the Hobbesian social contract theory, according to which the social, cooperative aspect of human life was grounded in the logically prior and fully articulated rational interests of individuals. Dewey's claim in Experience and Nature that the collection of meanings that constitute the mind have a social origin expresses the basic contention, one that he maintained throughout his career, that the human individual is a social being from the start, and that individual satisfaction and achievement can be realized only within the context of social habits and institutions that promote it.

Moral and social problems, for Dewey, are concerned with the guidance of human action to the achievement of socially defined ends that are productive of a satisfying life for individuals within the social context. Regarding the nature of what constitutes a satisfying life, Dewey was intentionally vague, out of his conviction that specific ends or goods can be defined only in particular socio-historical contexts. In theEthics (1932) he speaks of the ends simply as the cultivation of interests in goods that recommend themselves in the light of calm reflection. In other works, such as Human Nature and Conduct and Art as Experience, he speaks of (1) the harmonizing of experience (the resolution of conflicts of habit and interest both within the individual and within society), (2) the release from tedium in favor of the enjoyment of variety and creative action, and (3) the expansion of meaning (the enrichment of the individual's appreciation of his or her circumstances within human culture and the world at large). The attunement of individual efforts to the promotion of these social ends constitutes, for Dewey, the central issue of ethical concern of the individual; the collective means for their realization is the paramount question of political policy.

Conceived in this manner, the appropriate method for solving moral and social questions is the same as that required for solving questions concerning matters of fact: an empirical method that is tied to an examination of problematic situations, the gathering of relevant facts, and the imaginative consideration of possible solutions that, when utilized, bring about a reconstruction and resolution of the original situations. Dewey, throughout his ethical and social writings, stressed the need for an open-ended, flexible, and experimental approach to problems of practice aimed at the determination of the conditions for the attainment of human goods and a critical examination of the consequences of means adopted to promote them, an approach that he called the "method of intelligence."

The central focus of Dewey's criticism of the tradition of ethical thought is its tendency to seek solutions to moral and social problems in dogmatic principles and simplistic criteria which in his view were incapable of dealing effectively with the changing requirements of human events. In Reconstruction of Philosophyand The Quest for Certainty, Dewey located the motivation of traditional dogmatic approaches in philosophy in the forlorn hope for security in an uncertain world, forlorn because the conservatism of these approaches has the effect of inhibiting the intelligent adaptation of human practice to the ineluctable changes in the physical and social environment. Ideals and values must be evaluated with respect to their social consequences, either as inhibitors or as valuable instruments for social progress, and Dewey argues that philosophy, because of the breadth of its concern and its critical approach, can play a crucial role in this evaluation.

In large part, then, Dewey's ideas in ethics and social theory were programmatic rather than substantive, defining the direction that he believed human thought and action must take in order to identify the conditions that promote the human good in its fullest sense, rather than specifying particular formulae or principles for individual and social action. He studiously avoided participating in what he regarded as the unfortunate practice of previous moral philosophers of offering general rules that legislate universal standards of conduct. But there are strong suggestions in a number of his works of basic ethical and social positions. In Human Nature and Conduct Dewey approaches ethical inquiry through an analysis of human character informed by the principles of scientific psychology. The analysis is reminiscent of Aristotelian ethics, concentrating on the central role of habit in formulating the dispositions of action that comprise character, and the importance of reflective intelligence as a means of modifying habits and controlling disruptive desires and impulses in the pursuit of worthwhile ends.

The social condition for the flexible adaptation that Dewey believed was crucial for human advancement is a democratic form of life, not instituted merely by democratic forms of governance, but by the inculcation of democratic habits of cooperation and public spiritedness, productive of an organized, self-conscious community of individuals responding to society's needs by experimental and inventive, rather than dogmatic, means. The development of these democratic habits, Dewey argues in School and Society andDemocracy and Education, must begin in the earliest years of a child's educational experience. Dewey rejected the notion that a child's education should be viewed as merely a preparation for civil life, during which disjoint facts and ideas are conveyed by the teacher and memorized by the student only to be utilized later on. The school should rather be viewed as an extension of civil society and continuous with it, and the student encouraged to operate as a member of a community, actively pursuing interests in cooperation with others. It is by a process of self-directed learning, guided by the cultural resources provided by teachers, that Dewey believed a child is best prepared for the demands of responsible membership within the democratic community.

5. Aesthetics

Dewey's one significant treatment of aesthetic theory is offered in Art as Experience, a book that was based on the William James Lectures that he delivered at Harvard University in 1931. The book stands out as a diversion into uncommon philosophical territory for Dewey, adumbrated only by a somewhat sketchy and tangential treatment of art in one chapter of Experience and Nature. The unique status of the work in Dewey's corpus evoked some criticism from Dewey's followers, most notably Stephen Pepper, who believed that it marked an unfortunate departure from the naturalistic standpoint of his instrumentalism, and a return to the idealistic viewpoints of his youth. On close reading, however, Art as Experience reveals a considerable continuity of Dewey's views on art with the main themes of his previous philosophical work, while offering an important and useful extension of those themes. Dewey had always stressed the importance of recognizing the significance and integrity of all aspects of human experience. His repeated complaint against the partiality and bias of the philosophical tradition expresses this theme. Consistent with this theme, Dewey took account of qualitative immediacy in Experience and Nature, and incorporated it into his view of the developmental nature of experience, for it is in the enjoyment of the immediacy of an integration and harmonization of meanings, in the "consummatory phase" of experience that, in Dewey's view, the fruition of the re-adaptation of the individual with environment is realized. These central themes are enriched and deepened in Art as Experience, making it one of Dewey's most significant works.

The roots of aesthetic experience lie, Dewey argues, in commonplace experience, in the consummatory experiences that are ubiquitous in the course of human life. There is no legitimacy to the conceit cherished by some art enthusiasts that aesthetic enjoyment is the privileged endowment of the few. Whenever there is a coalesence into an immediately enjoyed qualitative unity of meanings and values drawn from previous experience and present circumstances, life then takes on an aesthetic quality--what Dewey called having "an experience." Nor is the creative work of the artist, in its broad parameters, unique. The process of intelligent use of materials and the imaginative development of possible solutions to problems issuing in a reconstruction of experience that affords immediate satisfaction, the process found in the creative work of artists, is also to be found in all intelligent and creative human activity. What distinguishes artistic creation is the relative stress laid upon the immediate enjoyment of unified qualitative complexity as the rationalizing aim of the activity itself, and the ability of the artist to achieve this aim by marshalling and refining the massive resources of human life, meanings, and values.

The senses play a key role in artistic creation and aesthetic appreciation. Dewey, however, argues against the view, stemming historically from the sensationalistic empiricism of David Hume, that interprets the content of sense experience simply in terms of the traditionally codified list of sense qualities, such as color, odor, texture, etc., divorced from the funded meanings of past experience. It is not only the sensible qualities present in the physical media the artist uses, but the wealth of meaning that attaches to these qualities, that constitute the material that is refined and unified in the process of artistic expression. The artist concentrates, clarifies, and vivifies these meanings in the artwork. The unifying element in this process is emotion--not the emotion of raw passion and outburst, but emotion that is reflected upon and used as a guide to the overall character of the artwork. Although Dewey insisted that emotion is not the significant content of the work of art, he clearly understands it to be the crucial tool of the artist's creative activity.

Dewey repeatedly returns in Art as Experience to a familiar theme of his critical reflections upon the history of ideas, namely that a distinction too strongly drawn too often sacrifices accuracy of account for a misguided simplicity. Two applications of this theme are worth mentioning here. Dewey rejects the sharp distinction often made in aesthetics between the matter and the form of an artwork. What Dewey objected to was the implicit suggestion that matter and form stand side by side, as it were, in the artwork as distinct and precisely distinguishable elements. For Dewey, form is better understood in a dynamic sense as the coordination and adjustment of the qualities and associated meanings that are integrated within the artwork.

A second misguided distinction that Dewey rejects is that between the artist as the active creator and the audience as the passive recipient of art. This distinction artificially truncates the artistic process by in effect suggesting that the process ends with the final artifact of the artist's creativity. Dewey argues that, to the contrary, the process is barren without the agency of the appreciator, whose active assimilation of the artist's work requires a recapitulation of many of the same processes of discrimination, comparison, and integration that are present in the artist's initial work, but now guided by the artist's perception and skill. Dewey underscores the point by distinguishing between the "art product," the painting, sculpture, etc., created by the artist, and the "work of art" proper, which is only realized through the active engagement of an astute audience.

Ever concerned with the interrelationships between the various domains of human activity and concern, Dewey ends Art as Experience with a chapter devoted to the social implications of the arts. Art is a product of culture, and it is through art that the people of a given culture express the significance of their lives, as well as their hopes and ideals. Because art has its roots in the consummatory values experienced in the course of human life, its values have an affinity to commonplace values, an affinity that accords to art a critical office in relation to prevailing social conditions. Insofar as the possibility for a meaningful and satisfying life disclosed in the values embodied in art is not realized in the lives of the members of a society, the social relationships that preclude this realization are condemned. Dewey's specific target in this chapter was the conditions of workers in industrialized society, conditions which force upon the worker the performance of repetitive tasks that are devoid of personal interest and afford no satisfaction in personal accomplishment. The degree to which this critical function of art is ignored is a further indication of what Dewey regarded as the unfortunate distancing of the arts from the common pursuits and interests of ordinary life. The realization of art's social function requires the closure of this bifurcation.

6. Critical Reception and Influence

Dewey's philosophical work received varied responses from his philosophical colleagues during his lifetime. There were many philosophers who saw his work, as Dewey himself understood it, as a genuine attempt to apply the principles of an empirical naturalism to the perennial questions of philosophy, providing a beneficial clarification of issues and the concepts used to address them. Dewey's critics, however, often expressed the opinion that his views were more confusing than clarifying, and that they appeared to be more akin to idealism than the scientifically based naturalism Dewey expressly avowed. Notable in this connection are Dewey's disputes concerning the relation of the knowing subject to known objects with the realists Bertrand Russell, A. O. Lovejoy, and Evander Bradley McGilvery. Whereas these philosophers argued that the object of knowledge must be understood as existing apart from the knowing subject, setting the truth conditions for propositions, Dewey defended the view that things understood as isolated from any relationship with the human organism could not be objects of knowledge at all.

Dewey was sensitive and responsive to the criticisms brought against his views. He often attributed them to misinterpretations based on the traditional, philosophical connotations that some of his readers would attach to his terminology. This was clearly a fair assessment with respect to some of his critics. To take one example, Dewey used the term "experience," found throughout his philosophical writings, to denote the broad context of the human organism's interrelationship with its environment, not the domain of human thought alone, as some of his critics read him to mean. Dewey's concern for clarity of expression motivated efforts in his later writings to revise his terminology. Thus, for example, he later substituted "transaction" for his earlier "interaction" to denote the relationship between organism and environment, since the former better suggested a dynamic interdependence between the two, and in a new introduction to Experience and Nature, never published during his lifetime, he offered the term "culture" as an alternative to "experience." Late in his career he attempted a more sweeping revision of philosophical terminology in Knowing and the Known, written in collaboration with Arthur F. Bentley.

The influence of Dewey's work, along with that of the pragmatic school of thought itself, although considerable in the first few decades of the twentieth century, was gradually eclipsed during the middle part of the century as other philosophical methods, such as those of the analytic school in England and America and phenomenology in continental Europe, grew to ascendency. Recent trends in philosophy, however, leading to the dissolution of these rigid paradigms, have led to approaches that continue and expand on the themes of Dewey's work. W. V. O. Quine's project of naturalizing epistemology works upon naturalistic presumptions anticipated in Dewey's own naturalistic theory of inquiry. The social dimension and function of belief systems, explored by Dewey and other pragmatists, has received renewed attention by such writers as Richard Rorty and Jürgen Habermas. American phenomenologists such as Sandra Rosenthal and James Edie have considered the affinities of phenomenology and pragmatism, and Hilary Putnam, an analytically trained philosophy, has recently acknowledged the affinity of his own approach to ethics to that of Dewey's. The renewed openness and pluralism of recent philosophical discussion has meant a renewed interest in Dewey's philosophy, an interest that promises to continue for some time to come.

7. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

All of the published writings of John Dewey have been newly edited and published in The Collected Works of John Dewey, Jo Ann Boydston, ed., 37 volumes (Carbondale: Southern Illinois University Press, 1967-1991).

Dewey's complete correspondence has know been published in electronic form in The Correspondence of John Dewey, 3 vols., Larry Hickman, ed. (Charlottesville, Va: Intelex Corporation).

An authoritative collection of Dewey's writings is The Essential Dewey, 2 vols., Larry Hickman and Thomas M. Alexander, eds. (Bloomington, IN: Indiana University Press, 1998).

b. Secondary Sources

  • Alexander, Thomas M. The Horizons of Feeling: John Dewey's Theory of Art, Experience, and Nature. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1987.
  • Boisvert, Raymond D. Dewey's Metaphysics. New York: Fordham University Press, 1988.
  • Boisvert, Raymond D. John Dewey: Rethinking Our Time. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1998.
  • Bullert, Gary. The Politics of John Dewey. Buffalo, NY: Prometheus Books, 1983.
  • Campbell, James. Understanding John Dewey: Nature and Cooperative Intelligence. Chicago and La Salle: Open Court, 1995.
  • Damico, Alfonso J. Individuality and Community: The Social and Political Thought of John Dewey. Gainesville, FL: University Presses of Florida, 1978.
  • Dykhuizen, George. The Life and Mind of John Dewey. Carbondale: Southern Illinois University Press, 1973.
  • Eames, S. Morris. Experience and Value: Essays on John Dewey and Pragmatic Naturalism.Elizabeth R. Eames and Richard W. Field, eds. Carbondale: Southern Illinois University Press, 2003.
  • Eldridge, Michael. Transforming Experience: John Dewey's Cultural Instrumentalism. Nashville: Vanderbilt University Press, 1998.
  • Gouinlock, James. John Dewey's Philosophy of Value. New York: Humanities Press, 1972.
  • Hickman, Larry. John Dewey's Pragmatic Technology. Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1990.
  • Hickman, Larry A., ed. Reading Dewey: Interpretations for a Postmodern Generation. Bloomington and Indianapolis: Indiana University Press, 1998.
  • Hook, Sidney. John Dewey: An Intellectual Portrait. New York: John Day Co., 1939; New York: Prometheus Books, 1995.
  • Jackson, Philip W. John Dewey and the Lessons of Art. New Haven: Yale University Press, 1998.
  • Haskins, Casey and David I. Seiple, eds. Dewey Reconfigured: Essays on Deweyan Pragmatism.Albany: State University of New York Press, 1999.
  • Levine, Barbara. Works about John Dewey: 1886-1995. Carbondale and Edwardsville: Southern Illinois University Press, 1996.
  • Rockefeller, Steven C. John Dewey: Religious Faith and Democratic Humanism. New York: Columbia University Press, 1991.
  • Schilpp, Paul Arthur and Lewis Edwin Hahn, eds. The Philosophy of John Dewey, The Library of Living Philosophers, vol. 1. La Salle, IL: Open Court, 1989.
  • Sleeper, Ralph. The Necessity of Pragmatism: John Dewey's Conception of Philosophy. New York: Yale University Press, 1987.
  • Thayer, H. S. The Logic of Pragmatism: An Examination of John Dewey's Logic. New York: Humanities Press, 1952.
  • Tiles, J. E. Dewey. London: Routledge, 1988.
  • Welchman, Jennifer. Dewey's Ethical Thought. Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1995.

Author Information

Richard Field
Email: rfield(at)
Northwest Missouri State University
U. S. A.

Juan Donoso Cortés (1809—1853)

CortesJDJuan Donoso Cortés, parliamentary statesman, diplomat, government minister, royal counselor, theologian, and political theorist, may not be well known among modern political philosophers. However, his ideas had an enormous influence in the spheres of politics and religion in the nineteenth and twentieth centuries. Donoso’s theories were uniquely influential in shaping the ideological trajectory that began with the reaction against the Enlightenment and the French Revolution in the eighteenth century and culminated in the rise of fascism in the twentieth century. This Spanish Catholic and conservative thinker was the philosophical heir of Joseph de Maistre, one of the most prominent reactionary conservative thinkers of the late eighteenth and early nineteenth centuries. Even though his life was short and his works few in number, Donoso's contribution to modern political philosophy and theology cannot be ignored if we wish to have a more complete understanding of the ideas and actions that have shaped Europe and the Roman Church in recent centuries. His most notable idea—the theory on dictatorship—was Donoso’s most significant and unique contribution to modern political thought.

Table of Contents

  1. Philosophical Development and Context
  2. View of Human Nature
  3. Theory of Dictatorship
    1. Religious Dictatorship
    2. Political Dictatorship
  4. Views on Violence
  5. Views on History
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Philosophical Development and Context

In the early years of his life, Donoso's thinking was deeply influenced by the philosophes of the Enlightenment. His education was thoroughly grounded in the study of such Enlightenment thinkers as Rousseau, Montesquieu, Voltaire, and Diderot. It was only in the last years of his life that Donoso distinguished himself as a standard bearer of an ideological camp that stood in complete opposition to the philosophes. By the year 1848 Donoso was firmly in the camp of such contre-philosophes as Joseph de Maistre and Louis de Bonald.

Until the European revolution of 1848, the primary concern of reactionary conservative thinkers was the restoration of the pre-1789 monarchical ancien régime. The authority and hierarchical order that were the centerpieces of conservative thought, were seen only in the context of restoring and preserving a monarchical régime. The revolution of 1848 exposed the inability of many of the European monarchies to maintain authority and hierarchical order. Donoso was one of the first and most vociferous of conservative thinkers to acknowledge this. While like de Maistre he was something of a romantic medievalist who advocated a hierarchical social order, with the Pope of Rome at the head of that order wielding absolute spiritual and temporal power while all other temporal and ecclesiastical authorities ruled as his deputies, he was also a realist who could strategically adapt his ideology to contemporary exigencies. He was the first conservative thinker to develop an alternative theory that posited a different model of régime calculated to achieve the restoration and maintenance of the authority and hierarchical order that all conservatives saw as the foundation of civilization. This was his theory on dictatorship. Even though Donoso was always an ardent monarchist, like his precursor de Maistre, he was also enough of a political realist to know that the ultimate goal of a stable social order based on obedience to infallible authority and adherence to a rigid hierarchy of rank and privilege could be achieved by other means, if necessary. If monarchies were too feeble to maintain such a social order, then other forms of government, more harsh in nature, need to be instituted in order to subjugate human beings.

2. View of Human Nature

Like de Maistre, Donoso viewed human beings as essentially and naturally depraved and irrational. To Donoso, human beings are so irredeemably corrupt in moral capacity and intellectually drawn to absurdity that they must be ruled with an iron fist. All social and religious order depends upon the will of those who rule to demand and impose obedience to their dictates and belief in their teachings as well as upon the willingness of subjects to obey and believe their rulers, both secular and religious. Civilization, according to Donoso, can only be preserved through the imposition and acceptance of political and religious commands and dogmas. These commands and dogmas are the repressive mechanisms Donoso held as essential to the survival and preservation of civilization, especially that mode of civilization which Donoso called "Catholic." Repression, said Donoso, is one of the most essential elements of civilization. For Donoso, no amount of free and open discussion could ever arrive at any modicum of truth. He saw truth as revealed by God and mediated through God's chosen instrument, the Catholic Church and it's Supreme Pontiff. Discussion only opens the door to doubt, confusion, and discord thus preparing the ground for socialism. Discussion, which Donoso held as the cornerstone of liberalism, creates a belief vacuum that can only be filled by Christ or Antichrist, by Catholicism or socialism. In a begrudging sort of way, Donoso respected socialism more than liberalism because he saw the former as more akin to Catholicism, as something offering human beings a set of dogmatic beliefs. Liberalism can only offer doubt and uncertainty.

3. Theory of Dictatorship

In his Speech on Dictatorship, Donoso described two different types of repression which he saw as necessary for the survival and maintenance of civilization—political and religious. These two forms of repression must exist in an equilibrium in order to be effective. With a decline in religious repression must come a corresponding and proportional rise in political repression, and vice versa. As the "thermometer" of religious repression falls, the "thermometer" of political repression must rise; and as the "thermometer" of political repression falls, so the "thermometer" of religious repression must rise. All political and religious régimes must be repressive if political and religious order are to endure. Donoso emphasized that the legitimacy of a régime is not based upon heredity, but upon the capacity of a régime to be repressive. This constituted a major shift in conservative thinking. Concern was not focused as much on who should rule, but on how rule is to be exercised. While authority and hierarchical order remained the conservative ideal, Donoso introduced a degree of realistic pragmatism to how this ideal could be achieved and preserved. This shift had ominous consequences in the twentieth century since the door was opened to more radical and ruthless forms of political and religious control.

a. Religious Dictatorship

In the religious arena, Donoso's ideas on authority influenced the life of the Roman Catholic Church for over a century. Again echoing the views of de Maistre, Donoso thought that infallibility is an essential characteristic of authority. Authority is synonymous with infallibility. The power to command behavior and impose beliefs is not subject to error and must not be seen as subject to error. Without the exercise of and belief in infallible authority, Donoso thought that people and societies would sink into a morass of confusion, doubt, and error.

Donoso's theory on infallibility helped to lay the foundation for the doctrine of papal infallibility that was promulgated by Pope Pius IX in 1870 at the end of the First Vatican Council. His advice was sought by Pius IX through the papal nuncio to France in the early 1850s, Rafaello Cardinal Fornari, with regard to the drawing up of a list of religious and philosophical propositions that were to be condemned as heretical. Donoso's loathing for democracy, freedom of thought, freedom of speech, freedom of religion, rationalism, liberalism, socialism, pluralism, freedom of expression, and tolerance was reflected in his Letter to Cardinal Fornari. The ideas asserted in this letter appeared in Pius IX's decree the Syllabus of Errors.

The repressive methods of governance advocated by Donoso in his theory on dictatorship also influenced the development of a papal régime that rested upon the absolute exercise of power by the pope over the Church. Donoso's theories contributed to the development of a totalitarian ideology of papal supremacy and authority that dominated the Church until the Second Vatican Council in the early 1960s. A dictatorial papal régime was established by Pius IX that lasted through and reached its zenith during the pontificate of Pius XII. The Church endured a form of régime and a vision that pitted it in a holy war against modernity. His theories helped to shape the ideas and vocabulary that justified the establishment of a strong and centralized papal régime and the persecution of dissident and progressive Catholic thinkers—"modernists"— who sought to bring about a reconciliation between Christianity and the modern world.

b. Political Dictatorship

In the political arena, Donoso's influence was just as ominous. His theory of dictatorship and his critique of liberal democratic parliamentarianism significantly influenced the thinking of the twentieth century German conservative political theorist Carl Schmitt. Schmitt figured prominently in the development of the legal principles and structures of the Nazi régime. Schmitt's critique of parliamentary democracy rests heavily upon arguments first developed by Donoso. Furthermore, Schmitt's depiction of politics as a constant struggle of friends against enemies reflects Donoso's quasi-Manichæan view of politics as a war between Catholic civilization and philosophical civilization. Donoso's notion of infallible authority resonated in the Nazi Führerprinzip, the Italian fascist principle of Ducismo, and the principle of Caudillaje of the Franco régime in Spain (1936-75). The emphasis Donoso placed on infallible authority, his contempt of parliamentary democracy, and his support of dictatorial rule were common features of both conservative authoritarian as well as fascist régimes. Donoso's ideas were held in high esteem in Spain during the time of the Franco dictatorship and were also reflected in other conservative authoritarian régimes in Portugal under Salazar and Caetano, France under Pétain (the Vichy régime), Austria under Dollfuss and Schuschnigg, and Hungary under Horthy.

4. Views on Violence

Donoso's theory on sacrifices, developed in his Ensayo sobre el catolicismo, el liberalismo y el socialismo, endorsed violence as a social necessity. The spilling of blood by the State is essential in keeping the repressive equilibrium required to maintain a society. For every drop of blood spilled in crime, there must be an equal amount of blood spilled in the name of justice if authority and order are to be preserved. Criminal violence must be balanced with just violence; the violence that promotes evil must be met with the violence that promotes the good. Donoso saw human beings as so morally depraved and feeble in intellect that they require dictatorial rulers to regulate their behavior, priests to tell then what to believe and think, and executioners to punish them when they waver or depart from the commanded norms of behavior, thought, and belief. Kings, priests, and executioners are the pillars of civilization.

5. Views on History

Donoso's view of history reflect the influence of St. Augustine, Vico, and Hegel. It combines the eschatological perspective of Augustine with the historical cycles of Vico and the dialectical process of Hegel. History is a process of the unfolding of a divine plan guided by Providence toward a specific end, which is the triumph of good over evil, of Catholic civilization over philosophical civilization. The process advances in cycles wherein the recurrent theme of good against evil is played out in a dialectical manner until the end is reached. Each cycle in the dialectical process ends with what Donoso called the "supernatural triumph of good over evil." The action of divine Providence is essential in this process. Just as the executioner turns an evil into a good by replacing criminal violence with just violence, so Providence turns the natural triumph of evil into the supernatural triumph of the good. Donoso saw the natural triumph of evil in Jesus' death as a supernatural triumph at the same time. The evil of the crucifixion accomplished the good of human redemption. The evil that afflicts can also be a good that strengthens and saves. The evil of sin allows God to display the good that is manifested in his justice and his mercy. History is the playing out of this drama in a cyclic and dialectically structured process guided by divine Providence toward a definite conclusion-the ultimate triumph of good over evil. Catholic civilization, which Donoso depicted as totally good, will ultimately crush and triumph over that evil he called philosophical civilization.

Donoso can also be seen as a modern-day Cassandra uttering prophecies of apocalyptic doom. He saw the development of modern technology, symbolized by the telegraph for him, and the establishment of mass permanent armies and police forces as potential instruments in the hands of a future godless and socialistic tyranny. All of his efforts in the arenas of politics, philosophy, and religion were aimed at preventing the rise of such an evil. Revolution had to be met with counterrevolution, anarchy with dictatorship, freethinking with dogma, doubt with certainty, and discussion with decree. The ultimate battle for Donoso was to be a quasi-Manichæan struggle between Catholicism and socialism, or Catholic civilization and philosophical civilization, two systems of belief in a combat to the death for the control of societies and souls.

6. References and Further Reading

Works by Juan Donoso Cortés:

  • Juan Donoso Cortés, Antologia de Juan Donoso Cortés, edited by Francisco Elías de Tejada (Madrid: Editorial Tradicionalista, 1953)
  • Artículos políticos en "El Porvenir," edited by Federico Súarez Verdeguer (Pamplona: Ediciones Universidad de Navarra, 1992
  • Donoso Cortés y la fundación de "El Heraldo" y "El Sol," edited by Federico Súarez Verdeguer (Pamplona: Ediciones Universidad de Navarra, 1986)
  • Essai sur le catholicisme, le libéralisme et le socialisme, introduction by Arnaud Imatz (Bouère: Editions Dominique Martin Morin, 1986).
    • French translation of the Ensayo sobre el catolicismo, el liberalismo y el socialismo
  • Essay on Catholicism, Liberalism, and Order, translated by Madeleine Vincent Goddard, edited J. C. Reville (New York: Joseph F. Wagner, 1925).
    • English translation of the Ensayo
  • Essays on Catholicism, Liberalism, and Socialism, translated by Rev. William McDonald (Dublin: M. H. Gill and Son, 1879).
    • The second English translation of the Ensayo
  • Der Staat Gottes, translated by Ludwig Fischer (Darmstadt: Wissenschaftliche Buchgesellschaft, 1966).
    • German translation of the Ensayo
  • Obras completas de Don Juan Donoso Cortés, 2 vols., edited by Juan Juretschke (Madrid: Biblioteca de Autores Cristianos, 1946)
  • Obras completas de Donoso Cortés, 2 vols., edited by Carlos Valverde, S.J., (Madrid: Biblioteca de Autores Cristianos, 1970)
  • Selected Works of Juan Donoso Cortés, translated, edited, and introduced by Jeffrey P. Johnson (Wesport: Greenwood Press, 2000)
  • "Speech on Dictatorship," in Catholic Political Thought: 1789-1848, edited by Bela Menczer (South Bend: University of Notre Dame Press, 1962).

Works on Juan Donoso Cortés:

  • Gabriel de Armas, Donoso Cortés: su sentido trascendente de la vida (Madrid: Colección Cálamo, 1953)
  • Orestes Brownson, Orestes Brownson: Selected Essays, edited by Russell Kirk (Chicago: Regnery, 1955)
  • Catholic Encyclopedia, 1909 edition, s.v. "Donoso Cortés," by Condé B. Pallen; Jules Chaix-Ruy Donoso Cortés: Théologien de l'histoire et prophète (Paris: Beauchesne, 1956)
  • Alois Dempf, Christliche Staatsphilosophie in Spanien (Salzburg: Verlag Anton Pustet, 1937)
  • John T. Graham, Donoso Cortés: Utopian Romanticist and Political Realist (Columbia: University of Missouri Press, 1974)
  • R. A. Herrera, Donoso Cortés: Cassandra of the Age (Grand Rapids: Eerdmans, 1995)
  • Ramon Menéndez Pidal, La historia de España: la era Isabelina y el sexenio democrático (1834-1874), vol. XXXIV (Madrid: Espasa Calpe, 1981)
  • Raúl Sánchez Abelenda, La teoría del poder en el pensamiento político de Juan Donoso Cortés (Buenos Aires: Editorial Universitaria de Buenos Aires, 1969)
  • Carl Schmitt, La interpretación europea de Donoso Cortés (Madrid: Rialp, 1953); Political Theology, translated by George Schwab (Cambridge: MIT Press, 1985)
  • Edmund Schramm, Donoso Cortés: ejemplo del pensamiento de la tradición, (Madrid: Publicaciones Españolas, 1961); Donoso Cortés: Su vida y su pensamiento (Madrid: Espasa Calpe, 1936)
  • Federico Súarez Verdeger, Introducción a Donoso Cortés (Madrid: Rialp, 1964)
  • Carlos Valverde, S.J., "Introducción" in Obras completas de Donoso Cortés, vol. 1, edited by Carlos Valverde, S.J. ( Madrid: Biblioteca de Autores Cristianos, 1970); Dietmar Westemeyer, Donoso Cortés, hombre de estado y teólogo, translated by J. S. Mazpule (Madrid: Editora Nacional, 1957)
  • Frederick D. Wilhelmsen, Christianity and Political Philosophy (Athens: University of Georgia Press, 1978); Francis G. Wilson, Political Thought in National Spain (Champaign: Stipes, 1967).

Author Information

Jeffrey P. Johnson
U. S. A.

Cicero (106—43 B.C.E.)

cicero-02Marcus Tullius Cicero was born on January 3, 106 B.C.E. and was murdered on December 7, 43 B.C.E. His life coincided with the decline and fall of the Roman Republic, and he was an important actor in many of the significant political events of his time, and his writings are now a valuable source of information to us about those events. He was, among other things, an orator, lawyer, politician, and philosopher. Making sense of his writings and understanding his philosophy requires us to keep that in mind. He placed politics above philosophical study; the latter was valuable in its own right but was even more valuable as the means to more effective political action. The only periods of his life in which he wrote philosophical works were the times he was forcibly prevented from taking part in politics.

While Cicero is currently not considered an exceptional thinker, largely on the (incorrect) grounds that his philosophy is derivative and unoriginal, in previous centuries he was considered one of the great philosophers of the ancient era, and he was widely read well into the 19th century. Probably the most notable example of his influence is St. Augustine's claim that it was Cicero's Hortensius (an exhortation to philosophy, the text of which is unfortunately lost) that turned him away from his sinful life and towards philosophy and ultimately to God. Augustine later adopted Cicero's definition of a commonwealth and used it in his argument that Christianity was not responsible for the destruction of Rome by the barbarians.

Table of Contents

  1. Cicero's life
  2. Cicero's influence
  3. Cicero's thought
  4. Cicero and the Academic Skeptics
  5. Cicero and Stoicism and Peripateticism
  6. Cicero and Epicureanism
  7. Cicero's writings
    1. On Invention
    2. On the Orator
    3. On the Republic
    4. On the Laws
    5. Brutus
    6. Stoic Paradoxes
    7. The Orator
    8. Consolation
    9. Hortensius
    10. Academics
    11. On Ends
    12. Tusculan Disputations
    13. On the Nature of the Gods
    14. On Divination
    15. On Fate
    16. On Old Age
    17. On Friendship
    18. Topics
    19. On Duties
  8. Further reading on Cicero's life
  9. Further reading on Cicero's philosophy
    1. Texts by Cicero
    2. Texts about Cicero

1. Cicero's life

Cicero's political career was a remarkable one. At the time, high political offices in Rome, though technically achieved by winning elections, were almost exclusively controlled by a group of wealthy aristocratic families that had held them for many generations. Cicero's family, though aristocratic, was not one of them, nor did it have great wealth. But Cicero had a great deal of political ambition; at a very young age he chose as his motto the same one Achilles was said to have had: to always be the best and overtop the rest. Lacking the advantages of a proper ancestry, there were essentially only two career options open to him. One was a military career, since military success was thought to result from exceptional personal qualities and could lead to popularity and therefore political opportunity (as was the case much later for American presidents Ulysses S. Grant and Dwight D. Eisenhower). Cicero, however, was no soldier. He hated war, and served in the military only very briefly as a young man.

Instead, Cicero chose a career in the law. To prepare for this career, he studied jurisprudence, rhetoric, and philosophy. When he felt he was ready, he began taking part in legal cases. A career in the law could lead to political success for several reasons, all of which are still relevant today. First, a lawyer would gain a great deal of experience in making speeches. Second, he (there were no female lawyers in Rome) could also gain exposure and popularity from high-profile cases. Finally, a successful lawyer would build up a network of political connections, which is important now but was even more important in Cicero's time, when political competition was not conducted along party lines or on the basis of ideology, but instead was based on loose, shifting networks of personal friendships and commitments. Cicero proved to be an excellent orator and lawyer, and a shrewd politician. He was elected to each of the principle Roman offices (quaestor, aedile, praetor, and consul) on his first try and at the earliest age at which he was legally allowed to run for them. Having held office made him a member of the Roman Senate. This body had no formal authority -- it could only offer advice -- but its advice was almost always followed. He was, as can be imagined, very proud of his successes. (Though this is not the place for a long discussion of Roman government, it should be noted that the Roman republic was not a democracy. It was really more of an oligarchy than anything else, with a few men wielding almost all economic and political power).

During his term as consul (the highest Roman office) in 63 B.C.E. he was responsible for unraveling and exposing the conspiracy of Catiline, which aimed at taking over the Roman state by force, and five of the conspirators were put to death without trial on Cicero's orders. Cicero was proud of this too, claiming that he had singlehandedly saved the commonwealth; many of his contemporaries and many later commentators have suggested that he exaggerated the magnitude of his success. But there can be little doubt that Cicero enjoyed widespread popularity at this time - though his policy regarding the Catilinarian conspirators had also made him enemies, and the executions without trial gave them an opening.

The next few years were very turbulent, and in 60 B.C.E. Julius Caesar, Pompey, and Crassus (often referred to today as the First Triumvirate) combined their resources and took control of Roman politics. Recognizing his popularity and talents, they made several attempts to get Cicero to join them, but Cicero hesitated and eventually refused, preferring to remain loyal to the Senate and the idea of the Republic. This left him open to attacks by his enemies, and in January of 58 B.C.E. one of them, the tribune Clodius (a follower of Caesar's), proposed a law to be applied retroactively stating that anyone who killed a Roman citizen without trial would be stripped of their citizenship and forced into exile. This proposal led to rioting and physical attacks on Cicero, who fled the city. The law passed. Cicero was forbidden to live within 500 miles of Italy, and all his property was confiscated. This exile, during which Cicero could not take part in politics, provided the time for his first period of sustained philosophical study as an adult. After roughly a year and a half of exile, the political conditions changed, his property was restored to him, and he was allowed to return to Rome, which he did to great popular approval, claiming that the Republic was restored with him. This was also treated by many as an absurd exaggeration.

Cicero owed a debt to the triumvirate for ending his exile (and for not killing him), and for the next eight years he repaid that debt as a lawyer. Because he still could not engage in politics, he also had time to continue his studies of philosophy, and between 55 and 51 he wrote On the Orator, On the Republic, and On the Laws. The triumvirate, inherently unstable, collapsed with the death of Crassus and in 49 B.C.E. Caesar crossed the Rubicon River, entering Italy with his army and igniting a civil war between himself and Pompey (Caesar's own account of this war still survives). Cicero was on Pompey's side, though halfheartedly. He felt that at this point the question was not whether Rome would be a republic or an empire but whether Pompey or Caesar would be Emperor, and he believed that it would make little difference, for it would be a disaster in either case. Caesar and his forces won in 48 B.C.E., and Caesar became the first Roman emperor. He gave Cicero a pardon and allowed him to return to Rome in July of 47 B.C.E., but Cicero was forced to stay out of politics. Most of the rest of his life was devoted to studying and writing about philosophy, and he produced the rest of his philosophical writings during this time.

Caesar was murdered by a group of senators on the Ides of March in 44 B.C.E. Cicero was a witness to the murder, though he was not a part of the conspiracy. The murder led to another power struggle in which Mark Antony (of "Antony and Cleopatra" fame), Marcus Lepidus, and Octavian (later called Augustus) were the key players. It also gave Cicero, who still hoped that the Republic could be restored, the opportunity for what is considered his finest hour as a politician. With Caesar dead, the Senate once again mattered, and it was to the Senate that Cicero made the series of speeches known as the Philippics (named after the speeches the Greek orator Demosthenes made to rouse the Athenians to fight Philip of Macedon). These speeches called for the Senate to aid Octavian in overcoming Antony (Cicero believed that Octavian, still a teenager, would prove to be a useful tool who could be discarded by the Senate once his purpose was served).

However, Antony, Lepidus, and Octavian were able to come to terms and agreed to share power. Each of them had enemies that he wanted eliminated, and as part of the power-sharing deal each got to eliminate those enemies. Antony put not only Cicero but also his son, his brother, and his nephew on the list of those to be killed (the Philippics are not very nice to him at all, especially the Second Philippic). Though Octavian owed his success in part to Cicero, he chose not to extend his protection to Cicero and his family. Cicero, his brother, and his nephew tried somewhat belatedly to flee Italy. His brother and nephew turned aside to collect more money for the trip, and were killed. Cicero kept going. Plutarch describes the end of Cicero's life: "Cicero heard [his pursuers] coming and ordered his servants to set the litter [in which he was being carried] down where they were. He…looked steadfastly at his murderers. He was all covered in dust; his hair was long and disordered, and his face was pinched and wasted with his anxieties - so that most of those who stood by covered their faces while Herennius was killing him. His throat was cut as he stretched his neck out from the litter….By Antony's orders Herennius cut off his head and his hands." Antony then had Cicero's head and hands nailed to the speaker's podium in the Senate as a warning to others. Cicero's son, also named Marcus, who was in Greece at this time, was not executed. He became consul in 30 B.C.E. under Octavian, who had defeated Antony after the Second Triumvirate collapsed. As consul, the younger Marcus got to announce Antony's suicide to the Senate. It is unfortunate that we have no record of this speech.

2. Cicero's influence

While Cicero is currently not considered an exceptional thinker, largely on the (incorrect) grounds that his philosophy is derivative and unoriginal, in previous centuries he was considered one of the great philosophers of the ancient era, and he was widely read well into the 19th century. Probably the most notable example of his influence is St. Augustine's claim that it was Cicero's Hortensius (an exhortation to philosophy, the text of which is unfortunately lost) that turned him away from his sinful life and towards philosophy and ultimately to God. Augustine later adopted Cicero's definition of a commonwealth and used it in his argument that Christianity was not responsible for the destruction of Rome by the barbarians. Further discussion of Cicero's influence on later philosophers can be found in MacKendrick, Chapter 20 and Appendix.

3. Cicero's thought

Cicero subordinated philosophy to politics, so it should not surprise us to discover that his philosophy had a political purpose: the defense, and if possible the improvement, of the Roman Republic. The politicians of his time, he believed, were corrupt and no longer possessed the virtuous character that had been the main attribute of Romans in the earlier days of Roman history. This loss of virtue was, he believed, the cause of the Republic's difficulties. He hoped that the leaders of Rome, especially in the Senate, would listen to his pleas to renew the Republic. This could only happen if the Roman elite chose to improve their characters and place commitments to individual virtue and social stability ahead of their desires for fame, wealth, and power. Having done this, the elite would enact legislation that would force others to adhere to similar standards, and the Republic would flourish once again. Whether this belief shows an admirable commitment to the principles of virtue and nobility or a blindness to the nature of the exceedingly turbulent and violent politics of his time, or perhaps both, is impossible to say with certainty.

Cicero, therefore, tried to use philosophy to bring about his political goals. Like most intellectual endeavors in Cicero's time, philosophy was an activity in which Greece (and especially Athens) still held the lead. The Romans were more interested in practical matters of law, governance, and military strategy than they were in philosophy and art (many of Cicero's writings include justifications for his study of philosophy and arguments that it ought to be taken seriously). But for Cicero to really use philosophy effectively, he needed to make it accessible to a Roman audience. He did this in part by translating Greek works into Latin, including inventing Latin words where none seemed suitable for Greek concepts (including the Latin words which give us the English words morals, property, individual, science, image, and appetite), and in part by drawing on and idealizing Roman history to provide examples of appropriate conduct and to illustrate the arguments of philosophy. He also summarized in Latin many of the beliefs of the primary Greek philosophical schools of the time (and he is the source of much of our knowledge about these schools). These included the Academic Skeptics, Peripatetics, Stoics, and Epicureans. Cicero was well acquainted with all these schools, and had teachers in each of them at different times of his life. But he professed allegiance throughout his life to the Academy.

4. Cicero and the Academic Skeptics

In Cicero's time there were in fact two schools claiming to be descended from the First Academy, established by Plato. Cicero studied briefly in both the Old Academy and the New Academy; the differences between the two need not concern us. What they shared was their basic commitment to skepticism: a belief that human beings cannot be certain in their knowledge about the world, and therefore no philosophy can be said to be true. The Academic Skeptics offered little in the way of positive argument themselves; they mostly criticized the arguments of others.

This can be annoying, but it requires real mental abilities, including the ability to see all sides of an issue and to understand and accept that any belief, no matter how cherished, is only provisional and subject to change later if a better argument presents itself. It is the approach which underlies the modern scientific method, though the Academics did not use it in that way. Even something like evolution, for which there is mountains of evidence and seemingly no resonable alternative, is treated as a theory subject to change if needed rather than an eternal truth.

And it is this approach which Cicero embraced. This is not surprising if we consider again why he was interested in philosophy in the first place. As a lawyer, he would need to see as many sides of an argument as possible in order to argue his clients' cases effectively. He would have to marshal all the available evidence in a methodical way, so as to make the strongest possible case, and he would have to accept that he might at any time have to deal with new evidence or new issues, forcing him to totally reconsider his strategies. As a politician, he would need a similar grasp of the issues and a similar degree of flexibility in order to speak and to act effectively. A lawyer or politician who fanatically sticks to a particular point of view and cannot change is not likely to be successful. Adopting the teachings of the Academy also allowed Cicero to pick and choose whatever he wanted from the other philosophical schools, and he claims to do this at various points in his writings. Finally, his allegiance to the Academy helps to explain his use of the dialogue form: it enables Cicero to put a number of arguments in the mouths of others without having to endorse any particular position himself.

However, Cicero did not consistently write as a member of the Academy. Skepticism can, if taken to extremes, lead to complete inaction (if we can't be certain of the correctness of our decisions or of our actions, why do anything at all?) which was incompatible with Cicero's commitment to political activity. Even if it isn't taken that far, it can still be dangerous. It may not be a problem if trained, knowledgeable philosophers are skeptical about things like whether the gods exist or whether the laws are just. But if people in general are skeptical about these things, they may end up behaving lawlessly and immorally (see Aristophanes' Clouds for a portrayal of this). Thus, while Cicero is willing to accept Academic Skepticism in some areas, he is not willing to do so when it comes to ethics and politics. For doctrines in these areas, he turns to the Stoics and Peripatetics.

5. Cicero and Stoicism and Peripateticism

Cicero believed that these two schools taught essentially the same things, and that the difference between them was whether virtue was the only thing human beings should pursue or whether it was merely the best thing to be pursued. According to the first view, things like money and health have no value; according to the second, they have value but nowhere near enough to justify turning away from virtue to attain them. This was a difference with little practical consequence, so far as Cicero was concerned, and there is no need to take it up here.

Since, according to the teachings of the Academy, Cicero was free to accept any argument that he found convincing, he could readily make use of Stoic teachings, and he did so particularly when discussing politics and ethics. In the Laws, for example, he explicitly says that he is setting aside his skepticism, for it is dangerous if people do not believe unhesitatingly in the sanctity of the laws and of justice. Thus he will rely on Stoicism instead. He puts forth Stoic doctrines not dogmatically, as absolutely and always true, but as the best set of beliefs so far developed. We ought to adhere to them because our lives, both individually and collectively, will be better if we do. It is essentially Stoic ethical teachings that Cicero urges the Roman elite to adopt.

Stoicism as Cicero understood it held that the gods existed and loved human beings. Both during and after a person's life, the gods rewarded or punished human beings according to their conduct in life. The gods had also provided human beings with the gift of reason. Since humans have this in common with the gods, but animals share our love of pleasure, the Stoics argued, as Socrates had, that the best, most virtuous, and most divine life was one lived according to reason, not according to the search for pleasure. This did not mean that humans had to shun pleasure, only that it must be enjoyed in the right way. For example, it was fine to enjoy sex, but not with another man's wife. It was fine to enjoy wine, but not to the point of shameful drunkenness. Finally, the Stoics believed that human beings were all meant to follow natural law, which arises from reason. The natural law is also the source of all properly made human laws and communities. Because human beings share reason and the natural law, humanity as a whole can be thought of as a kind of community, and because each of us is part of a group of human beings with shared human laws, each of us is also part of a political community. This being the case, we have duties to each of these communities, and the Stoics recognized an obligation to take part in politics (so far as is possible) in order to discharge those duties. The Stoic enters politics not for public approval, wealth, or power (which are meaningless) but in order to improve the communities of which they are a part. If politics is painful, as it would often prove to be for Cicero, that's not important. What matters is that the virtuous life requires it.

6. Cicero and Epicureanism

For the Epicurean philosophy Cicero had only disdain throughout most of his life, though his best friend Atticus was an Epicurean. This disdain leads him to seriously misrepresent its teachings as being based on the shameless pursuit of base pleasures, such as food, sex, and wine (the modern day equivalent being sex, drugs, and rock'n'roll). However, this is not what Epicurus, who founded the school, or his later followers actually taught. Epicurus did claim that nature teaches us that pleasure is the only human good, and that life should therefore be guided by the pursuit of pleasure. But he meant by pleasure the absence of pain, including the pain caused by desires for wealth, fame, or power. This did not mean living life as one long Bacchanalia. Instead it meant withdrawing from politics and public life and living quietly with friends, engaged in the study of philosophy, which provided the highest pleasure possible (think of a monastery without the Bible and the rigorous discipline). The notion that the life of philosophy is the most pleasant life, of course, also comes from Socrates. Epicureans were also publicly atheists. Their atheism was based on a theory of atomism, which they were the first to propose. Everything in the universe, they argued, was made up of atoms, including the heavenly bodies; the gods did not exist. This knowledge was not a cause of despair but a cause of joy, they believed, since one of the greatest human pains is the pain caused by the fear of death and what lies beyond it. According to the Epicureans, death simply meant the end of sensation, as one's atoms came apart. Thus there was no reason to fear it, because there was no divine judgment or afterlife. The best known Epicurean is Lucretius, a contemporary of Cicero's at Rome who Cicero may have known personally. Lucretius' On the Nature of Things, available online, sets out Epicurean teachings.

It is easy to see why Cicero, a man deeply involved in politics and the pursuit of glory, would find any doctrine that advocated the rejection of public life repulsive. It is also easy to see why someone concerned with the reform of character and conduct would reject public atheism, since fear of divine punishment often prevents people from acting immorally. During his forced exile from politics at the end of his life, however, some of his letters claim that he has gone over to Epicureanism, presumably for the reasons he hated it previously. No longer able to take part in public life, the best he could hope for was the cultivation of private life and the pleasures that it had to offer. Since Cicero abandoned this idea as soon as the opportunity to return to public life arose, there is no reason to take his professed conversion seriously - unless we wish to see in it an example of changing his beliefs to reflect changing circumstances, and thus an example of his commitment to the Academy.

7. Cicero's writings

Cicero's written work can be sorted into three categories. None can be said to represent the "true" Cicero, and all of Cicero's work, we must remember, has a political purpose. This does not make it worthless as philosophy, but it should make us cautious about proclaiming anything in particular to be what Cicero "really thought." Also, as an Academic skeptic, Cicero felt free to change his mind about something when a better position presented itself, and this makes it even more difficult to bring his writing together into a coherent whole.

The first category of Cicero's work is his philosophic writings, many of which were patterned after Plato's or Aristotle's dialogues. These writings, in chronological order, include On Invention, On the Orator, On the Republic, On the Laws, Brutus, Stoic Paradoxes, The Orator, Consolation, Hortensius, Academics, On Ends, Tusculan Disputations, On the Nature of the Gods, On Divination, On Fate, On Old Age, On Friendship, Topics, On Glory, and On Duties. Unfortunately, several of them have been lost almost entirely (Hortensius, on the value of philosophy, the Consolation, which Cicero wrote to himself on the death of his beloved daughter Tullia in order to overcome his grief, and On Glory, almost totally lost) and several of the others are available only in fragmentary condition (notably the Laws, which Cicero may never have finished, and the Republic, fragments of which were only discovered in 1820 in the Vatican). These will be discussed in more detail below. While each of them is dedicated and addressed to a particular individual or two, they were intended to be read by a wide audience, and even at the end of his life Cicero never gave up entirely on the hope that the Republic and his influence would be restored. Hence these are not purely philosophical writings, but were designed with a political purpose in mind, and we are entitled to wonder whether Cicero is being entirely candid in the opinions that he expresses. Also, the dialogue form is useful for an author who wishes to express a number of opinions without having to endorse one. As we have seen, Cicero's skepticism would have made this an especially attractive style. We should not assume too quickly that a particular character speaks for Cicero. Instead we should assume that, unless he explicitly says otherwise, Cicero wanted all the viewpoints presented to be considered seriously, even if some or all of them have weaknesses.

The second category is the speeches Cicero made as a lawyer and as a Senator, about 60 of which remain. These speeches provide many insights into Roman cultural, political, social, and intellectual life, as well as glimpses of Cicero's philosophy. Many of them also describe the corruption and immorality of the Roman elite. However, they have to be taken with a grain of salt, because Cicero was writing and delivering them in order to achieve some legal outcome and/or political goal and by his own admission was not above saying misleading or inaccurate things if he thought they would be effective. In addition, the speeches that we have are not verbatim recordings of what Cicero actually said, but are versions that he polished later for publication (the modern American analogy would be to the Congressional Record, which allows members of Congress the opportunity to revise the text of their speeches before they are published in the Record). In some cases (such as the Second Philippic) the speech was never delivered at all, but was merely published in written form, again with some political goal in mind.

Finally, roughly 900 letters to and from (mostly from) Cicero have been preserved. Most of them were addressed to his close friend Atticus or his brother Quintius, but some correspondence to and from some other Romans including famous Romans such as Caesar has also been preserved. The letters often make an interesting contrast to the philosophic dialogues, as they deal for the most part not with lofty philosophical matters but with the mundane calculations, compromises, flatteries, and manipulations that were part of politics in Rome and which would be familiar to any politician today. It is important to be cautious in drawing conclusions from them about Cicero's "true" beliefs since they rely on an understanding between the sender and recipient not available to others, because they are often not the result of full reflection or an attempt at complete clarity and precision (after all, a friend can be counted on to know what you mean), and because many of them, like the speeches, were written with a political purpose in mind that may make them less than fully truthful and straightforward.

Space does not allow us to discuss Cicero's speeches and letters. The serious student of Cicero, however, will not want to ignore them. What follows is a brief summary of the main points each of Cicero's philosophical works.

a. On Invention

Written while Cicero was still a teenager, it is a handbook on oratory. Cicero later dismissed it and argued that his other oratorical works had superceded it.

b. On the Orator

A lengthy treatise, in the form of a dialogue, on the ideal orator. While it is full of detail which can be tedious to those who are not deeply interested in the theory of rhetoric, it also contains useful discussions of the nature of and the relationships among law, philosophy, and rhetoric. Cicero places rhetoric above both law and philosophy, arguing that the ideal orator would have mastered both law and philosophy (including natural philosophy) and would add eloquence besides. He argues that in the old days philosophy and rhetoric were taught together, and that it is unfortunate that they have now been separated. The best orator would also be the best human being, who would understand the correct way to live, act upon it by taking a leading role in politics, and instruct others in it through speeches, through the example of his life, and through making good laws.

c. On the Republic

This dialogue is, unfortunately, in an extremely mutilated condition. It describes the ideal commonwealth, such as might be brought about by the orator described in On the Orator. In doing so it tries to provide philosophical underpinnings for existing Roman institutions and to demonstrate that until the 20th century (the dialogue is set in 129 B.C.E.) Roman history has been essentially the increasing perfection of the Republic, which is now superior to any other government because it is a mixed government. By this Cicero means that it combines elements of monarchy, aristocracy, and democracy in the right balance; the contemporary reader may well disagree. But even this government can be destroyed and is being destroyed by the moral decay of the aristocracy. Thus Cicero describes the importance of an active life of virtue, the foundations of community, including the community of all human beings, the role of the statesman, and the concept of natural law. It also includes the famous Dream of Scipio.

d. On the Laws

This dialogue is also badly mutilated, and may never have been finished. In it Cicero lays out the laws that would be followed in the ideal commonwealth described in On the Republic. Finding the source of law and justice, he says, requires explaining "what nature has given to humans; what a quantity of wonderful things the human mind embraces; for the sake of performing and fulfilling what function we are born and brought into the world; what serves to unite people; and what natural bond there is between them." Philosophy teaches us that by nature human beings have reason, that reason enables us to discover the principles of justice, and that justice gives us law. Therefore any valid law is rooted in nature, and any law not rooted in nature (such as a law made by a tyrant) is no law at all. The gods also share in reason, and because of this they can be said to be part of a community with humanity. They care for us, and punish and reward us as appropriate. Much of what remains of this dialogue is devoted to religious law.

e. Brutus

This dialogue too is in a mutilated condition. It is a history of oratory in Greece and Rome, listing hundreds of orators and their distinguishing characteristics, weaknesses as well as strengths. There is also some discussion of oratory in the abstract. Cicero says that the orator must "instruct his listener, give him pleasure, [and] stir his emotions," and, as in On the Orator, that the true orator needs to have instruction in philosophy, history, and law. Such a person will have the tools necessary to become a leader of the commonwealth. This dialogue is less inclined to the argument that the orator must be a good man; for example, Cicero says that orators must be allowed to "distort history [i.e. lie] in order to give more point to their narrative."

f. Stoic Paradoxes

Not a dialogue; Cicero lays out six Stoic principles (called paradoxes) which the average listener would not be likely to agree with and tries to make them both understandable and persuasive to such a listener. It is, he says, an exercise in turning the specialized jargon of the Stoics into plain speech for his own amusement (which obviously does not require Cicero to actually agree with any of the Stoic beliefs). The beliefs discussed are as follows: moral worth is the only good; virtue is sufficient for happiness; all sins and virtues are equal; every fool is insane; only the wise man is really free; only the wise man is really rich. These topics are largely taken up again in the Tusculan Disputations. MacKendrick argues strenuously that this work is far more than an idle amusement, and that it showcases Cicero's rhetorical skills as well as being an attack on his enemies.

g. The Orator

Written in the form of a letter on the topic of the perfect orator, it includes a defense of Cicero's own oratorical style (Cicero was never known for his modesty). It emphasizes that the orator must be able to prove things to the audience, please them, and sway their emotions. It also includes the famous quote "To be ignorant of what occurred before you were born is to remain always a child."

h. Consolation

This text is lost except for fragments cited by other authors. Cicero wrote it to diminish his grief over the death of his daughter Tullia through the use of philosophy. From his letters we know that it was not entirely successful.

i. Hortensius

his text is heavily fragmented and we can determine little more than its broad outline. It is written in order to praise philosophy, which alone can bring true happiness through the development of reason and the overcoming of passions. In antiquity it was widely read and very popular; it was instrumental in converting St. Augustine to Christianity.

j. Academics

The positions of the various philosophical schools on epistemology (how we can perceive and understand the world) and the possibility of knowing truth are set out and refuted by the participants in this dialogue (of which we have different parts of two editions). Cicero also incorporates a detailed history of the development of these schools following the death of Socrates (diagrammed nicely in MacKendrick; see below). The nature of Cicero's own skepticism can be found in this work; the reader is left to choose the argument that is most persuasive.

k. On Ends

A dialogue which sets out the case, pro and con, of the several philosophic schools on the question of the end or purpose (what Aristotle called the telos) of human life. For Cicero, and arguably for ancient philosophy generally, this was the most important question: "What is the end, the final and ultimate aim, which gives the standard for all principles of right living and of good conduct?" Today many are inclined to believe that an answer to this question, if an answer exists at all, must be found in religion, but Cicero held that it was a question for philosophy, and this text was meant to popularize among the Romans the various answers that were being offered at the time. As with Academics, the reader must decide which case is most persuasive.

l. Tusculan Disputations

Another attempt to popularize philosophy at Rome and demonstrate that the Romans and their language had the potential to achieve the very highest levels of philosophy. The first book presents the argument that death is an evil; this argument is then refuted. The second book presents and refutes the argument that pain is an evil. The third book argues that the wise man will not suffer from anxiety and fear. In the fourth book Cicero demonstrates that the wise man does not suffer from excessive joy or lust. And in the fifth and final book Cicero argues that virtue, found through philosophy, is sufficient for a happy life. These positions are all compatible with Stoicism.

m. On the Nature of the Gods

This dialogue, along with the next two, was intended by Cicero to form a trilogy on religious questions. It offers desciptions of literally dozens of varieties of religion. Emphasis is especially placed on the Epicurean view (the gods exist but are indifferent about human beings), which is described and then refuted, and the Stoic view (the gods govern the world, love human beings, and after death reward the good and punish the bad), which is similarly stated and refuted. At the end of the dialogue the characters have not reached agreement. This is perhaps the dialogue that best illustrates Cicero's skeptical method.

n. On Divination

This dialogue too, according to Cicero, is meant to set out arguments both for and against a topic, in this case the validity of divination (predicting the future through methods such as astrology, reading animal entrails, watching the flight of birds, etc.) without asserting that either side is correct. The case for the validity of divination is presented in the first book and then crushed in the second (in which Cicero himself is the main speaker). While Cicero explicitly says that he reserves judgment, it is hard to conclude that Cicero approved of divination, which he saw as drawing on superstition rather than religion. Religion was useful because it helped to control human behavior and could be used as a tool for public policy; and in this context divination could be useful too (as when an unwise political decision was prevented by the announcement that the omens were unfavorable).

o. On Fate

The text is fragmented. The topic discussed is whether or not human beings can be said to have free will, so much of the book deals with theories of causation and the meaning of truth and falsehood. Cicero apparently rejects the idea that fate determines all our actions and argues that human beings, to a significant extent, have free will.

p. On Old Age

In this dialogue, we learn that the sufferings of old age do not affect everyone equally but in fact are dependent on character; old men of good character continue to enjoy life, though in different ways than in their youth, while men of bad character have new miseries added to their previous ones. Nothing is more natural than to age and die, and if we are to live in accordance with nature (a Stoic teaching) we should face death calmly. If one has lived well, there are many pleasant memories to enjoy, as well as prestige and the intellectual pleasures that are highest of all.

q. On Friendship

This dialogue describes the nature of true friendship, which is possible only between good men, who are virtuous and follow nature. This friendship is based on virtue, and while it offers material advantages it does not aim at them or even seek them. The dialogue goes on to describe the bonds of friendship among lesser men, which are stronger the more closely they are related but which exist even in more distant relationships. The conclusion is reached that all human beings are bonded together, along with the gods, in a community made up of the cosmos as a whole and based on shared reason. There is, however, awareness of the fact that in the real world friendship can be a difficult thing to maintain due to political pressures and adversity. It also includes the assertion that Cato was better than Socrates because he is praised for deeds, not words, which is perhaps the center of Cicero's personal philosophy (recall that he only wrote about philosophy, rhetoric and so on when political participation was denied to him by force), as well as the claim that love is not compatible with fear - a claim that Machiavelli found significant enough to explicitly reject in The Prince.

r. Topics

A toolkit for orators on the science of argument, touching on the law, rhetoric, and philosophy, and setting out the various kinds of arguments available to the orator, rules of logic, and the kinds of questions he may find himself facing. It has similarities to Aristotle's Topics and part of his Rhetoric.

s. On Duties

Written in the form of a letter to his son Marcus, then in his late teens and studying philosophy in Athens (though, we can gather from the letters, not studying it all that seriously), but intended from the start to reach a wider audience. Cicero addresses the topic of duty (including both the final purpose of life, which defines our duties, and the way in which duties should be performed), and says that he will follow the Stoics in this area, but only as his judgment requires. More explicitly, the letter discusses how to determine what is honorable, and which of two honorable things is more honorable; how to determine what is expedient and how to judge between two expedient things; and what to do when the honorable and the expedient seem to conflict. Cicero asserts that they can only seem to conflict; in reality they never do, and if they seem to it simply shows that we do not understand the situation properly. The honorable action is the expedient and vice-versa. The bonds among all human beings are described, and young Marcus is urged to follow nature and wisdom, along with whatever political activity might still be possible, rather than seeking pleasure and indolence. On Duties, written at the end of Cicero's life, in his own name, for the use of his son, pulls together a wide range of material, and is probably the best starting place for someone wanting to get acquainted with Cicero's philosophic works.

8. Further reading on Cicero's life

Plutarch's "Life of Cicero" is the source of much of our knowledge of Cicero's life. It should be kept in mind that Plutarch is writing a century after Cicero's death and has no firsthand knowledge of the events he describes. He also writes to offer moral lessons, rather than simply record events. The Roman historian Sallust's Conspiracy of Catiline offers a description of that conspiracy, written twenty years after it took place, which fails to give Cicero the same degree of importance he gave himself. Both of these texts are available online and in inexpensive Penguin editions. D.R. Shackleton Bailey, Cicero, incorporates many of Cicero's own letters in describing Cicero and the events of his life; the reader gets a firsthand look at events and a taste of Cicero's enjoyable prose style through these letters. Manfred Fuhrmann, Cicero and the Roman Republic, uses the same approach and also includes material from speeches and the philosophical writings. Christian Habicht, Cicero the Politician, is a short (99 pages of text) history of Cicero's life and times. Its brevity makes it a useful starting point and overview. Even shorter (84 pages of text) is Thomas Wiedemann, Cicero and the End of the Roman Republic. Weidemann even finds room for photographs and drawings, which makes this book perhaps too short. R.E. Smith, Cicero the Statesman, focuses on the period from 71 B.C.E.-43 B.C.E., which is the most active part of Cicero's life. He gives a very clear exposition of Roman politics as well as Cicero's part in it. Thomas Mitchell's two volumes, Cicero, the Ascending Years (which covers Cicero's life up to the end of his consulship) and Cicero the Senior Statesman (which covers the years from the end of his consulship to his death), in his words, aim to "provide a detailed and fully documented account of Cicero's political life that combines the story of his career with a comprehensive discussion of the political ideas and events that helped shape it." He succeeds admirably. There are also available a large number of general histories of the Roman Republic and empire which the reader is encouraged to explore.

9. Further reading on Cicero's philosophy

a. Texts by Cicero

The standard versions of Cicero's writings in English are still the Loeb editions of the Harvard University Press. They include the Latin text on the left hand pages and the English translation on the right hand pages, which is obviously of particular use to one who knows or is learning Latin. There are Loeb editions of all of Cicero's speeches, letters, and philosophical writings known to exist, and they were the main sources for this article. The Perseus Project includes Cicero's writings in its online archives. The series of Cambridge Texts in the History of Political Thought has recently added editions of On the Commonwealth and On the Laws (in one volume, edited by James E.G. Zetzel) and On Duties (edited by M.T. Griffin and E.M. Atkins). These volumes include the Cambridge series' usual excellent introductions and background material and were also helpful in preparing this article. The Oxford World's Classics series has recently released a new translation of On the Commonwealth and On the Laws (edited by Jonathan Powell and Niall Rudd); while its supplemental material is not as thorough as that of the Cambridge edition, it is still worth reading.

b. Texts by Cicero

Perhaps the best starting point is Neal Wood, Cicero's Social and Political Thought. It includes chapters on Cicero's life and times and then discusses Cicero's thought in a number of areas (for example there are chapters entitled "The Idea of the State" and "The Art of Politics"); admittedly its focus de-emphasizes Cicero's thought on religion, oratorical theory, and so on. A wider range of essays, which can best be appreciated after reading Cicero's texts, can be found in J.G.F. Powell, editor, Cicero the Philosopher: Twelve Papers. Andrew R. Dyck, A Commentary on Cicero, De Officiis (On Duty), is exactly what it says; it is massive (654 pages), detailed, relies on the reader's knowing Latin, and is of interest almost exclusively to the specialist. Paul MacKendrick, The Philosophical Books of Cicero, offers detailed summaries of each of Cicero's philosophical writings, as well as brief discussions which include the issue of Cicero's sources and originality for each text (Cicero is defended against the charges of unoriginality commonly made against him). It was extremely helpful in the preparation of this article. The final two chapters, as mentioned above, trace Cicero's influence down through the centuries and conclude with the observation that "Americans, though denied by their educational system a widespread knowledge of the classics in the original, share with Cicero a sturdy set of ethical values, which it is to be hoped they will, in true Ciceronian fashion, still cleave to in time of crisis."

Author Information

Edward Clayton
Central Michigan University
U. S. A.

Michael Dummett (1925—2011)

Michael DummettMichael Dummett was one of the most influential British philosophers of his generation.  His philosophical reputation is based partly on his studies of the history of analytical philosophy and partly on his own contributions to the philosophical study of logic, language, mathematics and metaphysics. The article deals first with the historical work, then with his on-going project, concluding with a brief discussion of his influence.

Of his historical work, it is his commentaries on Gottlob Frege that are of outstanding importance. Frege was primarily a mathematician, and Dummett has devoted a book to Frege’s philosophy of mathematics. More controversially, Dummett has argued that analytical philosophy is based on Frege’s insight that the correct way to study thought is to study language. He holds that Frege advocated a realist semantic theory. According to such a theory, every sentence (and thus every thought we are capable of expressing) is determinately true or false, even though we may not have any means of discovering which it is.

Dummett’s most celebrated original work lies in his development of anti-realism, based on the idea that to understand a sentence is to be capable of recognizing what would count as evidence for or against it. According to anti-realism, there is no guarantee that every declarative sentence is determinately true or false. This means that the realist and the anti-realist support rival systems of logic. Dummett argues that we should think in terms of a series of independent debates between realists and anti-realists, each concerned with a different type of language—so one might be an anti-realist about arithmetic but a realist, say, about the past. Dummett’s main philosophical project is to demonstrate that philosophy of language is capable of providing a definitive resolution of such metaphysical debates.  His work on realism and anti-realism involves all of the following fields: philosophy of mathematics, philosophy of logic, philosophy of language and metaphysics.

Table of Contents

  1. Biographical Information
  2. Dummett and Other Philosophers
    1. Wittgenstein: Meaning as Use
    2. Intuitionism: the Significance of Bivalence
    3. Frege and Dummett
      1. Frege: the Significance of Philosophy of Language
      2. Frege and the Origins of Semantics
      3. Frege's Unfinished Business
  3. Dummett on Realism and Anti-Realism
    1. Justifying Logical Laws by a Semantic Theory
    2. The Role of Proof-Theoretic Justification
    3. Justifying a Semantic Theory by Means of a Meaning-Theory
    4. Justificationist Semantics
    5. God
  4. On Immigration
  5. Dummett's Influence
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Biographical Information

Michael Dummett attended Sandroyd School and Winchester College, and served in the armed forces from 1943 to 1947. Although he was educated within the traditions of the Anglican Church at Winchester, by the age of 13 he regarded himself as an atheist. In 1944 however, he was received into the Roman Catholic Church, and he remains a practising Catholic. After his military service, he studied at Christ Church College, Oxford, graduating with First Class Honours in Philosophy, Politics and Economics in 1950 and then attained a fellowship at All Souls College. An All Souls fellowship is perhaps the ultimate academic prize open to Oxford graduates, providing an ideal opportunity to engage in research without any of the pressure that comes from having to teach, or to produce a doctoral thesis within a set period of time. From 1950 to 1951, Dummett was also Assistant Lecturer in Philosophy in Birmingham University. In Oxford, he was Reader in Philosophy of Mathematics from 1962 until 1974.

His first philosophical article was a book review, published in Mind in 1953. He has published many more articles since, most of which have been collected into three volumes. Several of the articles published in the 1950s and 1960s are considered by some to be classics, but, at this time, some members of the philosophical community worried that his published output would never match his true potential. This was partly because of his perfectionism, and partly because, from 1965 to 1968, he and his wife Ann chose to devote much of their time and energy to the fight against racism. In 1965, they helped to found the Oxford Committee for Racial Integration, which soon affiliated to a newly formed national organization, the Committee Against Racial Discrimination on whose national executive committee he served. However, CARD was wracked with internal divisions, and after an acrimonious annual convention in 1967 Dummett concluded that a white person could play only an ancillary role in the fight against racism. He did found a new organization, the Joint Council for the Welfare of Immigrants which focused specifically on immigration rights, but by 1969, his work as an activist had been reduced sufficiently to allow a return to philosophical research, and he resumed the task of writing his first major work, Frege: Philosophy of Language.

The book was eventually published in 1973 and it was a watershed in the study of Frege. Even so, the first edition was deficient in containing hardly any references to the text of Frege's work, a fault that was remedied in the second edition in 1981, published concurrently with The Interpretation of Frege's Philosophy, a book whose title is self-explanatory.

Between the first and second editions of Frege: Philosophy of Language, Dummett also published Elements of Intuitionism in 1977 (a second edition was published in 2000), and his first collection of papers, Truth and Other Enigmas in 1978. In 1979, he accepted the position of Wykeham Professor of Logic at Oxford, which he held until his retirement in 1992. Although Dummett had been connected with Oxford for the whole of his professional career, he has also taught and studied outside England. He held various visiting positions at Berkeley, Ghana, Stanford, Minnesota, Princeton, Rockefeller, Munster, Bologna and Harvard. The William James Lectures that he delivered at Harvard in 1976 were published in 1991 as The Logical Basis of Metaphysics, his most detailed study of the debates between realists and anti-realists. In the same year, he published his second collection of papers, Frege and Other Philosophers, and Frege: Philosophy of Mathematics, his long-awaited sequel to Frege: Philosophy of Language. His third collection of papers, The Seas of Language, was published in 1993.

The lectures he delivered at Bologna in 1987, entitled Origins of Analytical Philosophy, were published in 1988 in the journal Lingua e Stile. A translation into German was made by Joachim Schulte, and this was published along with Schulte's interview with Dummett in 1988, as Ursprünge der analytischen Philosophie. The book was subsequently published in Italian in 1990, in French in 1991, and in English in 1993. In 1996-1997, he delivered the Gifford Lectures in St. Andrews University, and these were published as Thought and Reality in 2006. He also gave the John Dewey Lectures at Columbia University in 2002, which were published as Truth and the Past in 2004. In 2001, he published On Immigration and Refugees, which is in part a contribution to moral and political philosophy. He also published works on voting systems and the history of card games, all of them subjects on which he was an authority. He received a Knighthood in 1999 in recognition of his efforts to fight racism, as well as for his philosophical work.

2. Dummett and Other Philosophers

There is an intimate connection between Dummett's studies of the history of analytical philosophy and his own contributions to the field. Much of his own work can only be understood as a response to other thinkers, who, he thinks, have set the agenda that analytical philosophers ought to follow. To understand anything of his work it is necessary to understand the significance that Wittgenstein, the intuitionists, and above all Gottlob Frege have for him.

a. Wittgenstein: Meaning as Use

Dummett states that early in his career (before he published the work on which his reputation rests), "I regarded myself, doubtless wrongly, as a Wittgensteinian" (Dummett, 1993a 171). The most important idea that Dummett took from the later works of Wittgenstein, is that "meaning is use". To know the meaning of a word is to understand that word, and to understand it is to be able to use it correctly. Of course, in order to be able to determine the significance of the claim that meaning is use, we must be able to spell out precisely what is involved in being able to use a word correctly: this is a task to which Dummett devoted a considerable amount of effort.

Wittgenstein also asserted in his later works that the task of philosophy is not to increase the sum of human knowledge, but to release us from the grip of confused metaphysical notions by drawing our attention to certain facts about meaning. Philosophy should limit itself to describing what we do in other areas of life, and should never attempt to alter our practices. Dummett states that, "I have never been able to sympathise with that idea," (Dummett, 1993a, 174) and, as he has noted, a Catholic philosopher could hardly be content to say that metaphysics is impossible (Dummett, 1978, 435). However, there seems to be a connection between Wittgenstein's suggestion that meaning is use and his rejection of metaphysics.

In Zettel, Wittgenstein asks the reader to consider two philosophers, one an idealist, the other a realist, who are raising their children to share their philosophical beliefs. An idealist holds that physical objects only exist in so far as they are perceived; talk of unperceived physical objects is merely a means to making predictions about future observations. The realist holds that physical objects exist independently of our capacity to perceive them. Wittgenstein suggests that both philosophers will teach their children how to use vocabulary about physical objects in exactly the same way, except, perhaps, that one child will be taught to say, "Physical objects exist independently of our perceptions," and the other will be taught to deny this. If this is the only difference between the two children, says Wittgenstein, "Won't the difference be one only of battle-cry?" (Wittgenstein, 1967, 74). For Wittgenstein, to understand the use of a word, in the manner that is relevant to philosophy, it is necessary to understand the role that sentences involving that word play in our lives. His claim in this case is that those sentences which philosophers take to express substantive statements about realism and idealism play no role whatsoever in our lives. The metaphysical sentences have no use, and so there is nothing to be understood—they are strings of words without a meaning. Wittgenstein's hope is that once we see that, in a given metaphysical dispute, both sides are divided by nothing more than their different battle cries, both parties will realize that there is nothing to fight about and so give up fighting.

The argument presented above for the conclusion that metaphysical disputes are arguments about nothing does not follow just from the doctrine that meaning is use: a necessary part of the argument was the controversial observation that one's stance on a particular metaphysical issue has no possible relevance to any practices in which one engages outside the arcane practice of arguing with other metaphysicians. This would have to be demonstrated for each metaphysical dispute in turn. Dummett accepts that meaning is use, but not that metaphysical problems need to be abandoned rather than solved. Therefore, he is faced with the challenge of explaining what content metaphysical statements have, by pointing out the exact connection between metaphysical doctrines and other practices in which we engage. Dummett met this challenge by focusing upon a disagreement in philosophy of mathematics, the dispute between intuitionists and Platonists.

b. Intuitionism: the Significance of Bivalence

In philosophy of mathematics, the term "platonism" is used to describe the belief that at least some mathematical objects (for example, the natural numbers) exist independently of human reasoning and perception. The Platonist is a realist about numbers. There are various forms of opposition to platonism. One form of anti-realism about mathematical objects is known as intuitionism.

Intuitionism was founded by L. E. J. Brouwer (1881-1966). The intuitionists argued that mathematical objects are constructed, and statements of arithmetic are reports by mathematicians of what they have constructed, each mathematician carrying out his or her own construction in his or her own mind. A concise statement of this case may be found in a lecture delivered by Brouwer in 1912 (Brouwer, 1983). This process of construction involves what Kant called "intuition", hence the name "intuitionism". Dummett does not, in fact, find the case presented by Brouwer very convincing, relying as it does on the idea that a mathematical construction is a process carried out by the individual mathematician within the privacy of his or her own mind. This seems to identify the meaning that one attaches to a mathematical term with a private mental object to which only that person has access. For Dummett, the significance of Brouwer lies not so much in the way that he and his immediate followers argued for their position, as in their exploration of the implications of their philosophical position for mathematical logic (Dummett, 1978, 215-247).

From an intuitionistic perspective, to claim that some mathematical proposition, P, is true is to claim that there is a proof of P, that is, that 'we' have access to a proof of P. It is the task of the mathematician to construct such proofs. To claim that the negation of P is true is to claim there is a proof that it is impossible to prove P. Of course, there is no guarantee that, for any arbitrary mathematical proposition, we will have either a proof of that proposition or a proof that no proof is possible. From the perspective of platonism, whether or not we have a proof, we know that P must be either true or false: mathematical reality guarantees that it has one of these two truth-values. From an intuitionist perspective, we have no such guarantee.

Consider, for example, Goldbach's conjecture, the conjecture that every even number is the sum of two primes. So far, nobody has discovered either a proof or a counter-example. It makes sense, from a realist perspective, to suppose that this conjecture might be true because every one of the infinite series of even numbers is a sum or two primes, even though there might be no proof to be discovered. As far as the intuitionist is concerned, the only thing that could make it true that all even numbers are the sum of two primes is that there be a proof. For all we know, according to the intuitionist, there might be no proof and no counter-example, in which case there is nothing to give the conjecture a truth-value.

The belief that every proposition is determinately true or false is the principle of bivalence. If we assert that the principle of bivalence holds of some set of propositions, even though we do not know whether, for every proposition in that set, there is sufficient evidence to confirm or refute that proposition, then our assertion of bivalence must be based on the belief that truth can transcend evidence. In dealing with mathematics, to have sufficient evidence to confirm a proposition is to have a proof of that proposition. So we see that, in the dispute between platonists (realists about numbers), and intuitionists (anti-realists about numbers), the realist affirms the principles of bivalence and that truth may transcend evidence, and the anti-realist denies these two principles.

Intuitionism is a doctrine that has clear implications for mathematical practice: the realist considers certain inferences to be valid which the intuitionist considers to be invalid. Suppose, for example, we have a proof that 'P implies R', and that 'not-P implies R'. In the form of logic favored by the realist, classical logic, we then have a proof of R, because we can apply the law of excluded middle, which tells us that 'P or not-P'. The intuitionist cannot appeal to the law of excluded middle. In order to derive R from 'P implies R' and 'not-P implies R', the intuitionist would also have to prove either P or not-P. In virtue of these clear implications for mathematical practice, the difference between the Platonist and the intuitionist can hardly be dismissed as merely one of battle-cry.

Dummett has suggested that certain other philosophical debates between realists and anti-realists should take the same form, once both sides properly understand the nature of the debate. The example taken from Wittgenstein concerned a debate between a realist and an idealist concerning physical objects. According to Dummett, the idealist's opposition to the view that physical objects exist independently of our perceptions of them should result in the rejection of both evidence-transcendent truth and bivalence. The idealist will be proposing some reform of classical logic, although it might not be exactly the same as that proposed by the intuitionist, since it will have to incorporate an account of what counts as sufficient evidence to confirm or refute a statement about physical objects. The important point to note is that the issue at stake will be which logical laws we should accept. If Dummett is correct, the great insight of the intuitionists was to realize that metaphysical disputes were really disputes about logical laws. However, we have also seen that he does not find the arguments of Brouwer and others in favor of this revision of classical logic to be compelling. He believed that the thinker who provided the tools that will enable us to solve such disputes was Gottlob Frege, not Brouwer.

c. Frege and Dummett

i. Frege: the Significance of Philosophy of Language

Gottlob Frege (1848-1925) was a mathematician by profession, whose work on the foundations of mathematics carried him deep into philosophical territory. His ultimate goal, for most of his career, was to demonstrate that all truths of arithmetic could be derived from purely logical premises. This position is known as "logicism." Frege's attempted proof of logicism was a failure, and, thanks to Kurt Gödel, we know that no single axiomatic system can suffice for the proof of all truths of arithmetic. In Frege: Philosophy of Mathematics Dummett attempts to pinpoint exactly where Frege went wrong. For current purposes, it is more important to understand the extent to which Dummett approves of Frege's work. Dummett has probably been the most important commentator on Frege. His interpretation of Frege's work is by no means universally accepted, but serious students of Frege's work can hardly afford to ignore it.

According to Dummett, Frege's unsuccessful project had two important by-products. In order to vindicate his logicism, Frege had to invent a language in which numbers could be defined by means of a more primitive logical vocabulary, and by means of which statements of arithmetic could be either proved or disproved. This Frege achieved in 1879, the major technical innovation being the use of quantifiers to handle statements involving multiple generality. In other words, Frege invented a formal language in which it is possible to display the difference between "Everybody loves somebody", and "There is somebody whom everybody loves", and to demonstrate clearly how different conclusions can be derived from each these. This was a major achievement, and all current formal languages, rely upon Frege's method for expressing such statements. Consequently, Frege has been crowned as the founder of modern formal logic.

It is hardly surprising that, having used logic to investigate the foundations of mathematics, Frege should also have been interested in the nature of logic itself. Frege wrote a variety of papers on the nature of thought, meaning and truth; and on a number of occasions, he attempted to combine these into a comprehensive treatise on logic. Dummett adopts the label "philosophy of language" for this aspect of Frege's work, and he views it as the second important by-product of Frege's failed project (Dummett, 1981b, 37).

Why does Dummett reject Frege's own term for this field of study, "logic", and instead describe it as "philosophy of language", a label whose accuracy has been disputed? Dummett rejects the label "logic" because he prefers to use that word in the narrow Aristotelian sense of the study of principles of inference (Dummett, 1981b, 37). That alone does not explain why he chooses "philosophy of language" as an alternative label, rather than, for example, "philosophy of thought." This label is adopted because he thinks that Frege's work made it natural for philosophers to take the "linguistic turn", and thus to become analytical philosophers, although Dummett acknowledges that Frege himself did not explicitly make this turn, and that some of his statements seem to be antithetical to it (Dummett, 1993a, 7). According to Dummett, the linguistic turn is taken when one recognizes

[F]irst, that a philosophical account of thought can be attained through a philosophical account of language, and, secondly, that a comprehensive account can only be so attained. (Dummett, 1993a, 4)

As an example of how Frege's approach to philosophical questions anticipated the explicit acknowledgement of the priority of language over thought, Dummett refers to Frege's use of the context principle in Die Grundlagen der Arithmetik, published in 1884. When faced with the question of what number words mean, Frege invokes the context principle, which is characterized by Dummett as

[T]he thesis that it is only in the context of a sentence that a word has a meaning: the investigation therefore takes the form of asking how we can fix the senses of sentences containing words for numbers. (Dummett, 1993a, 5)

It should be noted that the term that Dummett here translates as "sentence", Satz, is, in this passage, (p. x of Frege's original text) translated as "proposition" by J.L. Austin (Frege, 1980a, x) and Michael Beaney (Frege, 1997, 90). Dummett's translation is more favorable to his interpretation of the context principle as a linguistic principle than that of Austin and Beaney.

What is important, for Dummett, is that Frege does not approach the question of numbers by focusing on what is happening inside our heads when we think of a number. Frege, even if he did not explicitly embrace the linguistic turn, rejected psychologism—the view that would have us understand logic by studying private mental processes. Dummett holds that the rejection of psychologism leads more or less inevitably to the linguistic turn (Dummett, 1993a, 25).

On Dummett's view, the contrast between Brouwer and Frege could be put as follows. Brouwer introspected, and found that he had intuitions of proofs, but not of numbers. Frege focused on sentences containing numerical terms, asking whether the numerical terms functioned as names, and whether there was a guarantee that such sentences were all determinately true or false, holding that an affirmative answer to each of these two questions would be sufficient to establish that numbers are objects—the presence or absence of any private mental ideas or intuitions being irrelevant.

Even if the use Frege makes of the context principle in the Grundlagen makes a turn to philosophy of language inevitable, that need not in itself be seen as a contribution to philosophy of language. Indeed, Dummett himself writes as follows of the Grundlagen:

Realism is a metaphysical doctrine; but it stands or falls with the viability of a corresponding semantic theory. There is no general semantic theory in, or underlying the Grundlagen; the context principle repudiates semantics. That principle, as understood in the Grundlagen, ought therefore not to be invoked as underpinning realism, but as dismissing the issue as spurious. (Dummett, 1991a, 198)

Dummett holds that Frege did supply a semantic theory in his writings after the Grundlagen, indeed, a few lines after the paragraph cited above, he adds:

Full-fledged realism depends on—indeed, may be identified with—an undiluted application to sentences of the relevant kind a straightforward two-valued classical semantics: a Fregean semantics in fact.

A "straightforward two-valued classical semantics" involves a commitment to bivalence, and we have already seen why Dummett views this as the defining feature of realism. Commentators who do not accept Dummett's characterization of realism would not necessarily agree with his characterization of Frege as a realist, since it is not a label that Frege himself adopts. We must now consider what it was that Frege added to his philosophy after the Grundlagen that constitutes, on Dummett's view, a general semantic theory incorporating the principle of bivalence. If the Grundlagen can be used by Dummett as evidence that Frege's work made a turn to philosophy of language inevitable, it is to his later writings that he turns for evidence of Frege's contributions to philosophy of language.

ii. Frege and the Origins of Semantics

Dummett describes Frege as a realist in virtue of his semantic theory. Frege never explicitly described himself as a realist, and never explicitly stated that he was advancing a semantic theory. Dummett's interpretation provides a framework for evaluating the views that Frege did explicitly advance. To understand Dummett's interpretation of Frege, it will be useful to see how this interpretation can be used to make sense of the views advanced in Frege's most influential paper, "Über Sinn und Bedeutung" (Frege, 1892). The translation of Bedeutung has been a controversial question; a guide is given in Beaney's preface to (Frege, 1997, 36-46). Dummett's preferred translation is "reference" (Dummett, 1981a, 84), so that the title of the article would be "On Sense and Reference". The standard English translations (Frege, 1980b, 56-79 and Frege, 1997, 151-172) both include page references to the original text of 1892.

Frege introduces the distinction between sense and reference by the example of proper names. It is frequently informative to be told that two names stand for the same object: it was, for example, a significant discovery that the evening star is the morning star. In such a case, Frege says that we are discovering that two names that have a different sense have the same reference. They have the same reference because they stand for the same object, they have a different sense because, in each case, the object is presented in a different way (Frege, 1892, 26). Frege then asserts that, in indirect speech, rather than using a name to speak of the object referred to, as is usual, we speak about the sense. If "the morning star" and "the evening star" really do designate one and the same object, then any true statement that includes the phrase "the morning star" can be converted into a true statement in which the phrase "the evening star" is substituted for "the morning star" throughout. An obvious exception to this rule would be a statement such as "Before it was discovered by the Babylonians that the morning star is the evening star, people did not believe the evening star was visible in the morning" (Frege, 1892, 28). Frege's claim is that the sense is that which is understood by users of a word. When we talk about pre-Babylonian astronomical beliefs, what is relevant to the truth of what we say is the understanding people then had of "the morning star", and not, as is more usual, the morning star itself.

Frege is very clear that the sense of a word is something objective: two people grasp one and the same sense of a word, just as two people may view the moon through one and the same telescope (Frege, 1892, 31). Frege then introduces a new piece of terminology: a name designates its reference, but expresses its sense (Frege, 1892, 32).

Having introduced the distinction between sense and reference, Frege then asks whether a sentence has a reference (Frege, 1892, 32). He starts by asserting that a sentence expresses a thought. This implies, of course, that a thought is the sense of a sentence, because what is expressed is a sense. He also observes that when we alter the sense of any part of a sentence, the sense of the whole sentence is altered (Frege, 1892, 32). So, just as two people can both grasp the sense of a particular name, they can also grasp the sense of a particular sentence: that is, different people can think the very same thought. Now that it is established that a sentence has a sense, and that the sense of the sentence depends upon the sense of the parts of the sentence, Frege argues that if the sentence has a reference, this too would depend on the reference of the parts. If a proper name lacks a bearer, then it will not have a reference, and one would expect that a sentence that contains a name without a bearer would lack a reference. Frege considers an example of a sentence that contains a name without a bearer, a sentence from The Odyssey about Odysseus—Frege is supposing that there is no such person as Odysseus. Frege asserts that such a sentence fails to be true or false: what the sentence lacks is a truth-value (Frege, 1892, 33). This leads Frege to conclude that the reference of a sentence is its truth-value: he states that the True and the False are objects, and truth-values, and that all sentences either name one of these two objects, or else they are names that fail to name anything (Frege, 1892, 34).

Frege then finds further support for this conclusion. He has already stated that if two names stand for the same object, one name may be substituted for the other without changing the truth of what is said, unless, as in indirect speech, we are using a name to designate the sense that that name usually bears. Frege claims that the same applies to sentences. When one sentence contains another as its part, the truth-value of the larger sentence is unchanged when the sentence that forms a part is replaced by another sentence that bears the same truth-value, unless we are dealing with indirect speech (Frege, 1892, 36). Frege proceeds to defend this claim in the rest of the article, analyzing particular cases.

Dummett holds that there are two guiding principles that we need in order to understand Frege's work on sense and reference. The first is that Frege is offering a semantic theory, in which the reference of an expression is its semantic value, the second is that to understand the relationship between a word and its referent, we must take as a model the relationship between a name and its bearer (Dummett, 1981a, 190).

A semantic theory explains how the truth-value of a sentence is determined by its parts. In a semantic theory, every simple expression is assigned a semantic value, and the semantic value of a complex expression is determined by the semantic value of the simple expressions from which it is composed. The truth-value of a sentence is determined by the semantic value of its parts.

Consider, for example, the expressions "George Lucas", "Gottlob Frege", "contributed to mathematical logic", and "directed a famous film". The sentence "Gottlob Frege contributed to mathematical logic" is true, but the sentence "George Lucas contributed to mathematical logic" is not true. This is because "Gottlob Frege" and "George Lucas" each have a different semantic value, or, in plain English, "Gottlob Frege" and "George Lucas" are not two different names for the same person (and George Lucas made no independent contribution to mathematical logic). Similarly, from the fact that "Gottlob Frege contributed to mathematical logic" is true, but "Gottlob Frege directed a famous film" is not true, we can conclude that "... directed a famous film" and "... contributed to mathematical logic" do not share the same semantic value.

Semantic theories have a role in the justification of systems of formal logic. Dummett holds that Frege used his work on sense and reference to justify his formal system in exactly the way that logicians today use what is explicitly described as a semantic explanation. Indeed, Dummett sees Frege's work as providing the foundations for all current work in semantics of natural language (Dummett, 1981a, 81-83).

Dummett does not just claim that Frege had a semantic theory; he claims that he had a realist semantic theory. The semantic theory is realist because the prototype of a term's semantic value is the object designated by a name: a term's having a semantic value is equated with its picking out non-linguistic reality, and the failure to pick out non-linguistic reality would result in a failure to have a semantic value (Dummett, Frege: Philosophy of Language, 1981a, 404). From Frege's perspective, if an expression lacks a semantic value, then that really is a failure: a semantic value is something that no expression should be without. If a (declarative) sentence lacks a truth-value, that is because something has gone wrong: all (declarative) sentences should be either true or false, because their components should all denote bits of reality.

iii. Frege's Unfinished Business

Dummett holds that it was an important turning point when Frege described a sentence as a proper name for a truth-value. He thinks that, at this point, Frege lost sight of an important insight embodied in the context principle: the importance of the sentence as the smallest unit of language that can be used to say something. Once a sentence is treated as just a proper name, and a truth-value as just another object, there is no acknowledgement that there is something special about the role of a sentence in language (Dummett, 1981a, 195-196).

Dummett is also unsatisfied by Frege's account of sense. We have seen that, for Frege, several people may grasp the sense of one word or of one thought, and that just as the sense of a name denotes an object, the sense of a thought denotes a truth-value. But what is involved in grasping a sense?

Frege's answer is that senses are neither part of the world of spatio-temporal objects, nor do they exist inside the minds of individuals. They belong to a "third realm", a timeless world, to which all of us have access. Dummett is far from endorsing the suggestion that thoughts occupy a third realm beyond time and space. He describes this doctrine as a piece of "ontological mythology", the term "mythology" here being used in a purely pejorative sense (Dummett, 1993a, 25). Dummett thinks that these two loose ends should be tied together. Rather than being content to describe the act of understanding as involving a mysterious connection between our minds and timeless entities known as senses, we should focus on the practice of using sentences in a language. This, in turn requires us to think about the purpose of classifying sentences as true or false, and that requires that we think about the purposes for which we use a language (Dummett, 1981a, 413). The result of this process might be to vindicate Frege's semantics, or it might vindicate the intuitionist position. Dummett's most influential contribution to philosophy can be understood as an attempt to resolve this unfinished business.

3. Dummett on Realism and Anti-Realism

Along with his historical work, Dummett is known for his on-going work on a grand metaphysical project. The aim of this project is to find a means of resolving a number of debates, each of which has a common form but a different subject matter. In each debate, there is a realist, and an anti-realist, and they differ concerning which logical principles they apply to statements of the type that are under dispute—as it may be, statements of arithmetic, statements about the past, about the future, about the physical world, about possible worlds, and so forth. To decide in favor of anti-realism in one instance does not mean that one must always decide in favor of anti-realism, and the same is true for realism.

Some of Dummett's papers deal with arguments that are quite specific to one particular debate—for example, he discusses the charge that anti-realism about the past is ultimately self-defeating, since what is now the present will be the past (Dummett, "The Reality of the Past", in his 1978), and he has advanced an argument about the nature of names for non-existent natural-kinds that is intended to undercut David Lewis's argument for the thesis that all possible worlds are real (Dummett, "Could There Be Unicorns?" in his 1993b). However, he is best known for advancing a generic line of argument that the anti-realist in any particular debate could appeal to. That does not mean that he thinks that the anti-realist will always be successful. In his valedictory lecture as Wykeham Professor of Logic, he stated:

I saw the matter, rather, as the posing of a question how far, and in what contexts, a certain generic line of argument could be pushed, where the answers 'No distance at all' and 'In no context at all' could not be credibly entertained, and the answers 'To the bitter end' and 'In all conceivable contexts' were almost as unlikely to be right. (Dummett, 1993b, 464)

The difference between the realist and the anti-realist, in each case, concerns the correct logical laws, because, for reasons explained in section 2.2, Dummett thinks that metaphysical debates are properly understood as debates about logical laws. Dummett's most complete statement of the nature of such metaphysical debates, and the means by which they can be resolved was The Logical Basis of Metaphysics (Dummett, 1991b).

a. Justifying Logical Laws by a Semantic Theory

According to Dummett, to find out how to resolve metaphysical disputes, we must find out how to justify a logic—that is, a set of principles of inference. Logic is the study of validity—an inference is valid if, and only if, the truth of the premises guarantees the truth of the conclusion. The logician wants to be able to recognize such truth-preserving inferences by their structure. More precision can be achieved by presenting inferences in a formal system (Dummett, 1991b, 185), and precision comes to be of vital importance when we are trying to choose between rival logical systems.

The logician wants to be able to recognize, from the structure of one set of sentences, that the members of another set of sentences are true. One method of validating rules of inference is by means of a semantic theory. In such a theory, every expression is assigned a semantic value, and an account is offered of how the semantic value of a complex expression is based upon the semantic value of its components. The aim of the semantic theory is to explain how the parts of a sentence determine the truth-value of that sentence (Dummett, 1991b, 23-25), as was explained above.

At this point, it may be helpful to focus upon a particular inference and a particular semantic theory. Suppose that we assign the following semantic values to symbols in the following way. P and Q stand for atomic sentences, which have either the value true, or the value false, and never both values. The symbol "~" when followed by a symbol which stands for an atomic sentence has the opposite value of the value of that atomic sentence. The symbol "(x v y)", where x and y are replaced by symbols which stand for atomic sentences has the value true when at least one of those atomic sentences has the value true. Otherwise, it has the value false. Next, we consider the following argument:

(1) (P v Q)
(2) ~Q
Therefore P.

To validate this inference, we must show that if (1) and (2) are true, then the conclusion, P, must also be true. If (2) is true, then Q is false. If Q is false, then if (1) is true, it must be in virtue of the truth of P, since if both P and Q were false, (1) could not be true. So we must suppose that P is true, and that is what we were trying to demonstrate.

In this case, the semantic theory used incorporated the principle of bivalence: every sentence was assigned either the value true or the value false. For reasons explained in sections 2.2 and 2.3.2, Dummett considers this to be characteristic of realist semantics. There is no one simple alternative to the principle of bivalence. One could depart from bivalence in virtue of having more than two truth-values, or in virtue of admitting that there are sentences without a truth-value, or in virtue of believing that we have no guarantee that all sentences will have one of the two values true or false. Just as there are many alternatives to bivalence, there are many alternatives to classical logic. Although Dummett's work on deduction has its roots in the debate over intuitionism, it does not necessarily follow that, in every case, the alternative logic advocated by a Dummett-style anti-realist would be intuitionistic logic. The correct logical principles should become clear once the correct semantic theory is established.

Of course, in this case, it probably was not necessary to offer a semantic theory in order to convince the reader of the validity of the inference. Indeed, the astute reader might well wonder whether such a procedure can serve to justify a logical law at all. Did we not invoke logical laws when explaining how the inference under discussion was justified?

The answer is that we did—but this need not render the justification circular. Dummett is clear that he is not trying to show how deductive practices could be justified to someone who is completely skeptical about the possibility of deduction; rather, he is considering how we might decide whether a particular rule of inference, which is accepted by some logicians but not by others, is justifiable. As long as no logical law that is under dispute is used in the semantic theory, it will be possible to offer a justification that does not beg the question. It is important to note that the set of logical laws that are used in the semantic theory need not be co-extensive with the set of logical laws that are justified thereby (Dummett, 1991b, 204).

b. The Role of Proof-Theoretic Justification

Dummett devotes considerable attention to establishing a procedure that can be used to show that a law is beyond dispute, a procedure that he terms "third-grade proof-theoretic justification." These are the logical laws that can be used in the semantic theory without fear of controversy. It is not possible to explain the procedure in full here, only to outline the basic principles on which the procedure is based.

As we have seen, logic deals with our ability to recognize that one set of sentences implies that all the members of some other set of sentences are true, in virtue of the structure of the sentences. The task of a system of formal logic is to display the structure, or form, in virtue of which such inferences are possible. Within such a system, the principal operator in a sentence indicates which other sentences may be derived from that sentence, possibly in conjunction with other sentences. For example, the symbol "&" may be used to indicate conjunction: if it is true to assert P & Q, then we know that it is true to assert P and true to assert Q. When we derive, for example, P from P & Q, we are said to be applying an elimination rule for "&": a rule which states how to derive from a sentence which contains "&" a sentence which does not contain "&". As well as elimination rules, a logical constant also has introduction rules. We apply an introduction rule for "&" if, having derived P from one formula, and Q from another, we then assert P & Q.

Let us assume (and this assumption is not trivial), that, whenever we assert a sentence containing "&", that sentence could have been derived by means of the introduction rule. Given the set of introduction and elimination rules for "&", along with our assumption, it will be clear that, if we add the constant "&" to a language, the only sentences that we can now assert, although we were not entitled to assert them before, are sentences which contain "&". When we derive some new sentence from a sentence containing "&", by applying the elimination rule, the final sentence will be one that we could have asserted anyway. In technical terms, this means that if we extend the language by adding the term "&", we have only a conservative extension. Dummett is in agreement with Belnap's thesis is that if we can show, for some rule, that adding this rule to a language involves only a conservative extension, then we have a reason for supposing that the addition of this rule has been justified (Dummett, 1991b, 217-220).

The assumption that, when we have a sentence containing a logical constant, that sentence could have been derived using the introduction rule for the constant, is referred to by Dummett as "the fundamental assumption". It is necessary to consider, for each logical constant whose introduction and elimination rules we wish to justify, whether the fundamental assumption is correct for it. Consider, for example, disjunction, "v"—that is, the logical constant which is more or less equivalent in meaning to "or". The standard introduction rule for disjunction is that, if one can assert P, one can assert "P v Q", and if one can assert Q, then one can assert "P v Q". To decide whether the fundamental assumption is true in this case, it is necessary to consider whether, if I see a child running across the street and say "A boy or a girl is running across the street," it is always true that I could have looked more closely, and been in a position to say either "A boy is running across the street," or "A girl is running across the street." It is a difficult task to spell out the precise content of "could have", and thus a difficult task to determine whether the fundamental assumption should be accepted for each constant (Dummett, 1991b, 270).

Even if we accept the fundamental assumption, not every alleged logical rule involves making merely a conservative extension to the language. Suppose we know that "If P, then Q" is true and also "If not-P, then Q", and from this, we derive "Q". Here, we are applying an elimination rule that does not involve a merely conservative extension of the language, because it could be that the truth of "Q" was not used in deriving either of the two conditional statements.

The technical apparatus for examining whether adding some constant to the language involves a conservative or non-conservative extension is known as "proof-theory". It was pioneered by Gerhard Gentzen. Dummett's third-grade proof theoretic justification builds on the work of Dag Prawitz. Dummett's requirements are, in fact, more stringent than that adding an operator to a language involve a merely conservative extension of the language, because it is necessary to take into account that two or more operators each of which, taken on its own, involves a conservative extension might, taken together, involve a non-conservative extension, (Dummett, 1991b, 286-290), but we cannot discuss all those details fully here.

It must be remembered that Dummett is not arguing that we should accept only those logical laws which can be justified by these means—rather, he is suggesting that these logical laws are the ones which can be taken for granted when trying to justify more controversial principles. Logical constants that are justified by third-grade proof-theoretic justification are above reproach. Other logical constants may be justified, if at all, by a semantic theory. Proof-theoretic justification is not sufficient to settle disputes about logical laws: it is a useful means of showing that an inference is valid, but it is less useful as a test for invalidity. The set of logical laws that are justified by a semantic theory need not be the same as the set of logical laws that are appealed to in explaining that theory (Dummett, 1991b, 301).

So, we settle a debate about a logical law by offering a semantic theory—but that just pushes the problem back one stage further; we must still consider how to settle debates about rival semantic theories. Dummett's answer is that just as a logic may be justified by a semantic theory, a semantic theory may, in turn be justified by being made the basis of a meaning-theory.

c. Justifying a Semantic Theory by Means of a Meaning-Theory

A meaning-theory is an explanation of the skill that anyone who understands a language has. As language-users, we are faced, continually, with sentences that we have never before encountered. It seems that there must be some set of rules of which we have implicit knowledge, which enable us to deduce the meaning of new sentences. Dummett is by no means alone in seeking for such a theory: in particular, there is a certain amount of overlap between Dummett's thinking and that of Donald Davidson, although it would be well beyond the scope of this article to examine the similarities and differences between these two thinkers in detail.

One suggestion, which Davidson has advocated strongly, is that a meaning-theory would specify a set of rules from which we could derive, for any sentence, a knowledge of the conditions under which that sentence is true. The suggestion is that, if you know of some sentence of a foreign language that the sentence is true if the cat is on the mat, and false if the cat is not on the mat, then you know that the sentence in question means "The cat is on the mat."

Dummett endorses the proposal that this is the best suggestion currently on offer for constructing a meaning-theory (Dummett, 1991b, 164), and notes that such a theory must be built on foundations laid by Frege. However, he distinguishes between a strong and a weak sense in which truth can be the central notion of a meaning-theory. In the strong sense, meaning is to be explained in terms of truth-conditions, as above, and it is simply taken for granted that we know what truth is. If truth is central to the meaning-theory only in the weak sense, then although knowledge of the meaning of a sentence is equated with knowledge of its truth-conditions, some further explanation is offered of what it is for a sentence to be true (Dummett, 1991b 113, 161-163). For example, an intuitionist would say that to understand some mathematical formula, it is necessary to be able to distinguish between those mathematical constructions which do and those which do not constitute proofs of the formula in question: truth is here being explained in terms of provability. If truth is central to the meaning-theory in the strong sense, however, grasp of truth-conditions is not explained in terms of any more fundamental notion: we are just told that to understand the meaning is to understand the truth-conditions, it being assumed that, for every sentence, there is something which renders it either true or false.

The connection between a semantic theory and a meaning-theory should now be apparent. Both the realist and the anti-realist offer semantic theories that explain how the semantic value of a sentence is determined by the semantic value of its parts. A meaning-theory of the type favored by Dummett will explain how, when we see what words are used in a sentence and the order in which they are put together, we are enabled to understand the truth-conditions for that sentence. The realist, adhering to the principle of bivalence, supposes that all the sentences will be determinately true or false. The anti-realist, on the other hand, can bring other notions into play to explain what it is for a sentence to be true.

So, the logic is justified by a semantics; the semantics is justified by a meaning-theory. How is the meaning-theory to be justified? A meaning-theory is judged to be successful according to whether it provides us with a satisfactory explanation of what it is to understand a language. It is important to note that Dummett requires that the meaning-theory provide us with a genuine explanation of what understanding is. He points out that while it is, no doubt, correct to say that someone understands the meaning of "Davidson has a toothache" if, and only if, they know that an utterance of this sentence is true if, and only if, Davidson has a toothache, this account fails to provide us with a non-circular explanation of what it is to understand the utterance. We want to be told exactly what it is to know that such an utterance is true. Meaning-theories of this type are classified by Dummett as "modest", and he urges other philosophers to set about the harder task of providing more ambitious meaning-theories, meaning-theories that are, in his terminology, "full-blooded." A full-blooded theory offers an explanation of understanding, which does not rely on a prior grasp of concepts such as "understanding", or "knowing the truth-conditions" (Dummett, 1991b, 113, 136).

d. Justificationist Semantics

We are now in a position to consider the "generic line of argument" that Dummett considers can be advanced by the anti-realist. This argument makes use of the Wittgensteinian principle that meaning is use. Dummett takes this to mean that there can be no element in linguistic understanding that is not manifested in the way a word is used in practice. When we recognize that a sentence is true, we are manifesting that we have a certain ability—the ability to recognize that the sentence has been verified. The same holds when we recognize that a sentence has been decisively refuted. According to an anti-realist meaning-theory ( in which justification is central), the ability to recognize when a sentence has been decisively confirmed or refuted is constitutive of knowing the meaning. (Dummett terms this a justificationist semantics). According to the realist, knowledge of how a sentence may be confirmed or refuted is answerable to a prior knowledge of the meaning.

Dummett is aware that the realist suggestion is far more intuitively compelling. However, he argues that it may yet prove to be mistaken. He offers several arguments, of which I will summaries one. Suppose that realism is correct. In that case, our ability to agree about what things are yellow is dependent upon our shared understanding of what makes it true that something is yellow. It would therefore be possible that, tomorrow, everything which is yellow becomes orange and vice versa, and that, at the same time, we all undergo a collective psychological change, so that things which are really yellow now appear to us to be orange, and vice versa. In other words, a major change would have taken place in reality, and yet none of us would notice it. Given that we had not altered the truth-conditions of sentences involving "yellow" and "orange", we would now be making many false utterances using these words. Yet this widespread falsity would pass entirely unnoticed; indeed, it would be entirely inconsequential. Our assertions would be fulfilling perfectly every purpose that they have, and yet would be false. If we admit this possibility, it seems incorrect to say, as Dummett thinks we should, that truth is the goal of our assertions. Truth and falsity would have lost their connection with practice.

Alternatively, one might argue that we would still be making true statements using "yellow" and "orange", but that the meanings of the words "yellow" and "orange" would have been altered. In that case, meaning has been altered, even though there is no observable difference in the practice, and so meaning has lost its connection with practice.

For the anti-realist, this possibility cannot arise, because there is no gap between what makes an assertion correct, and the most direct means that we have of checking that assertion. Dummett does allow that there will be indirect means of confirming a sentence, that is, methods for showing that, had we applied our most direct, or canonical method of verification, it would have been successful (Dummett, 1991b, 313-314).

It is by this type of argument that Dummett hopes to persuade us to rethink our attachment to realism. Of course, he does not think that we will know whether to be a realist or an anti-realist about a specific subject matter until we have a well-worked out meaning-theory. He does not assert that in all cases the correct meaning-theory will be an anti-realist one. Indeed, he has also offered reasons for supposing that "global anti-realism”—the thesis that anti-realism is always correct—is untenable (for example, Dummett, 1978, 367). Dummett’s anti-realism was first formulated as a thesis about arithmetic, and, as he points out, applying it to empirical discourse is not a straightforward matter:

The fundamental difference between the two lies in the fact that, whereas a means of deciding a range of mathematical statements or any other effective mathematical procedure, if available at all, is permanently available, the opportunity to decide whether or not an empirical statement holds good may be lost: what can be effectively decidable now will no longer be effectively decidable next year, nor, perhaps, next week. (Dummett, 2004, 42)

The most extreme form of anti-realism would be the theory that a statement about the past is rendered true or false only by evidence available to the speaker at the time of asserting it. This would imply that if the only evidence for the occurrence of an event is that some individual remembers it, and that individual takes the memory to their grave, then when the witness dies it ceases to be true that the event took place. However, it is basic to Dummett’s whole approach that meaning is determined by how a community uses the language; an individual acting alone cannot confer a meaning. Justification is therefore a collective enterprise; what matters is not whether I can verify a statement, but whether we can verify it, where ‘we’ are a community that includes people who are now dead. Dummett therefore rejects this most extreme form of anti-realism about the past as being too solipsistic. (Dummett, 2004, 67-68)
For this reason, Dummett accepts that some concession must be made to realism when it comes to dealing with statements about the past. He has made different suggestions about how much should be conceded: in his Gifford lectures, he argued that a proposition is true if and only if we are or were in a position to establish its truth, in the Dewey lectures that a proposition is true if and only if someone suitably placed would have been able to do so. The latter implies that statements concerning times before any human being existed have a determinate truth-value on the grounds that, if someone had existed then, they would have been able to confirm or deny such statements. (Dummett, 2006, vii-viii) These two lecture series offer quite different views about the nature of time.

It should be noted that the philosophical motivation for making a concession to realism is the attempt to do justice to the manner in which statements about the past are justified. Dummett’s justificationist approach to semantics does not imply a dogmatic insistence on anti-realism. Rather, he advocates a method for spelling out what it is to grasp truth-conditions by focusing on the way in which that grasp of truth-conditions is manifested. His central objection to truth-conditional semantics is that their advocates presuppose that we know what it is for something to be true, yet they never explain what constitutes such knowledge. This he regards as an act of faith that stands in need of a rational foundation. (Dummett, 2006, 55) Whatever concessions the justificationist may make to the realist, this central principle is not compromised.

e. God

In his Gifford Lectures, Dummett presents an argument for the existence of God that depends on his justificationist semantics. According to justificationist semantics, any account of the way the world is must be an account of the way the world is perceived by someone. We know that different animals perceive the world in different ways, and we aspire to break out of the limitations of merely human perception, and perceive the world as it is in itself—the single reality that underlies the very different perceptions that constitute the world of dogs and the world of humans.

By means of science, we have made some progress towards understanding the world as it is in itself—we can point to ways in which scientific descriptions of the world are improvements on the description based on our bare perceptions, so our aspiration to know the world as it is in itself cannot be dismissed as an incoherent longing. But insofar as this aspiration is coherent, "in itself" cannot mean "without reference to the perceptions of any being."

We might be led to suppose that perceptions had been successfully eliminated from our account of how the world is if we focus on abstract mathematical models used by scientists, but this is an error. Abstract mathematical models are a necessary part of science, but many such structures exist as models for mathematicians to study. We must be saying something further when we say of one such structure that it is not merely an object of mathematical study, but a true description of the way the world is. This ‘something further’ would include an explanation of how to apply the favored mathematical description, and that would mean matching the abstract mathematical description to perceptions.

Dummett concludes that the single world that underlies the different perceptions of humans and other species can only be understood as being the world as apprehended by a being whose knowledge constitutes the way things are—in other words, the world as apprehended by God. (Dummett, 2006, 103) Dummett thinks that this demonstrates that there exists a Creator who controls and sustains the universe, but he concedes that it is hard to reconcile Biblical statements about God’s goodness with the presence of evil in the world. (Dummett, 2006, 106)

4. On Immigration

Dummett’s work against racism was not motivated by philosophy, but it did result in his publishing a work of moral and political philosophy in 2001. The book, On Immigration and Refugees is aimed at a wide audience. In the first half, Dummett argues for a set of general principles concerning rights of immigrants and refugees. In the second half, he examines the recent history of the United Kingdom (with some discussion of other nations), analyzing the reasons why successive governments have failed to live up to the moral standards defended in the first part of the book.

Dummett’s starting point is that everyone is under an obligation to behave justly in the sense of giving people what they are due, which includes the necessities for living a fully human life. He argues that political philosophy has usually focused on the duties that a state has to its citizens, overlooking the fact that a state also represents its citizens to the outside world. Forming a corporation of any kind does not remove normal human obligations, or grant any right to be selfish, so it is immoral to congratulate politicians for upholding the interests of their own citizens at the expense of giving others what is due to them. One basic human right is to be a "first-class citizen" of some state, that is, a citizen of a state whose values one shares and where one does not face unjust persecution.

Starting from these premises, Dummett argued that there should be a presumption in favor of the right to migrate. The state has a right to refuse entry to criminals, or to halt mass immigration to prevent over-population or the submergence of its culture and language. He emphasized that in practice these conditions are rarely met, and argued that although British colonial authorities encouraged immigration policies that submerged the native population in Fiji and Malaya, the claim that British culture is being "swamped" by immigrants is merely a cover for racism. He also argued that those who are stateless have the right to become citizens of another state. Dummett recommended the creation of a commission run by the United Nations to handle such cases.

5. Dummett's Influence

A few philosophers, notably Crispin Wright (Wright, 1983) and Neil Tennant (Tennant, 1987, 1997), have attempted to extend the project of providing anti-realist semantics for empirical language. More commonly, philosophers have reacted to Dummett's work by attempting to demonstrate that his anti-realist arguments are not successful. Even if they are not, it may yet be that he has provided the correct account of what is at stake in metaphysical disputes concerning realism, and the correct account of the proper framework for resolving disputes about fundamental logical laws. Of course, not all philosophers who have considered the matter are agreed even upon that. How often do philosophers agree about anything?

This lack of agreement may not be surprising, but one of Dummett's early ambitions was to show how philosophers could achieve agreement. His claim was that, once the contributions of Frege are fully appreciated, it would be possible to formulate a method for achieving generally agreed resolutions to problems concerning theories of meaning, and that such work should be viewed as providing the foundations for all future work in philosophy.

He himself pointed out that the similar claims have been made for the work of Husserl, Kant, Spinoza and Descartes, to name but a few, and that, in each case, such claims proved false:

[B]y far the safest bet would be that I am suffering from a similar illusion in making this claim about Frege. To this, I can offer only the banal reply which any prophet has to make to any sceptic: time will tell. (Dummett, 1978, 458)

It may be too early to judge, but so far the passage of time has favored the skeptics rather than the prophet; there does not seem to be a general consensus about how to resolve disputes in philosophy of language, even among analytical philosophers. However, one does not have to agree with Dummett to appreciate that his work is important. His historical work has been devoted towards formulating the basic premises that underlie much contemporary philosophy, including his own. In so doing, he has provided a useful service for critics; those who find themselves out of sympathy with analytical philosophy at least know where to direct their attacks. One does not have to find Dummett's challenge to classical logic successful to accept that it is worth taking seriously.

It is widely acknowledged that Dummett's work is not easy to read. His work has been influential despite this. Indeed, his influence may be attributed, in part, to some of those factors that make his work hard to read, such as his refusal to accept superficial solutions, and his skill in unearthing hidden complexities. These features make for work that is daunting to beginners, but rewarding for experts. To read Dummett's work is to be reminded continuously that anyone who is serious about wanting to discover the answers to deep philosophical questions must be prepared to work very hard. That is a lesson well worth learning.

6. References and Further Reading

Works by Dummett in English

  • (Co-edited with John Crossley): Formal Systems and Recursive Functions: Proceedings of the Eighth Logic Colloquium, Oxford 1963 (Amsterdam: North-Holland, 1965)
  • Frege: Philosophy of Language (London: Duckworth, and Cambridge MA: Harvard University Press, 1st ed. 1973; 2nd ed. 1981a)
  • Elements of Intuitionism (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1st ed. 1977; 2nd ed. 2000)
  • Truth and Other Enigmas (London: Duckworth, and Cambridge MA: Harvard University Press, 1978)
  • Catholicism and the World Order: Some Reflections on the 1978 Reith Lectures (London: Catholic Institute for International Relations, 1979)
  • (with Sylvia Mann): The Game of Tarot: from Ferrara to Salt Lake City (London: Duckworth, 1980)
  • Twelve Tarot Games (London: Duckworth, 1980)
  • Immigration: Where the Debate Goes Wrong (2nd ed, London, 1981)
  • The Interpretation of Frege's Philosophy (London: Duckworth, and Cambridge MA: Harvard University Press, 1981b)
  • Voting Procedures (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1984)
  • The Visconti-Sforza Tarot Cards (New York: George Braziller, 1986)
  • Frege and Other Philosophers (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1991)
  • Frege: Philosophy of Mathematics (London: Duckworth, and Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1991a)
  • The Logical Basis of Metaphysics (London: Duckworth, and Cambridge MA: Harvard University Press, 1991b)
  • Grammar and Style for Examination Candidates and Others (London: Duckworth, 1993)
  • Origins of Analytical Philosophy (London: Duckworth and Cambridge MA: Harvard University Press, 1993a)
  • The Seas of Language (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1993b)
  • (with Ronald Decker and Thierry Depaulis): A Wicked Pack of Cards (London: Duckworth, 1996)
  • Principles of Electoral Reform (Oxford University Press, Oxford: 1997)
  • Grammar and Style for Examination Candidates and Others (London: Duckworth, 1993)
  • Origins of Analytical Philosophy (London: Duckworth and Cambridge MA: Harvard University Press, 1993a)
  • The Seas of Language (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1993b)
  • (with Ronald Decker and Thierry Depaulis): A Wicked Pack of Cards (London: Duckworth, 1996)
  • Principles of Electoral Reform (Oxford University Press, Oxford: 1997)
  • On Immigration and Refugees (London: Taylor and Francis, 2001)
  • Truth and the Past (New York: Columbia University Press, 2004)
  • Thought and Reality (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2006)

A complete bibliography of Dummett’s writings may be found in Randall E. Auxier and Lewis Edwin Hahn (eds.) The Philosophy of Michael Dummett: The Library of Living Philosophers, Volume XXXI (Chicago and La Salle: Open Court, 2007)

Books about Dummett

  • Barry Taylor (ed.) Michael Dummett, Contributions to Philosophy (Dordrecht: Kluwer, 1987)
  • B. McGuinnes and G. Oliveri (eds.) The Philosophy of Michael Dummett (Dordrecht: Kluwer, 1994)
  • Richard Heck (ed.) Language, Thought and Truth (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1998)
  • Johannes L. Brandl and Peter Sullivan (eds.) New Essays on the Philosophy of Michael Dummett (Amsterdam: Rodolpi, 1998)
  • Darryl Gunson, Michael Dummett and the Theory of Meaning (Aldershot: Ashgate, 1998)
  • Karen Green, Dummett: Philosophy of Language (Oxford: Blackwell, 2001)
  • Bernhard Weiss, Michael Dummett: Philosophy Now (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 2002)

Other Works Cited

  • L. E. J. Brouwer, 'Intuitionism and Formalism', in P. Benacerraf and H. Putnam (eds.) Philosophy of Mathematics: Selected Readings (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2nd ed. 1983)
  • Gottlob Frege, "Über Sinn und Bedeutung" in Zeitschrift für Philosophie und philosophische Kritik 1892.
  • Gottlob Frege, (trans. J. L. Austin) The Foundations of Arithmetic (Oxford: Blackwell, 1950, 1953, 1980a)
  • Gottlob Frege, (ed. Peter Geach and Max Black), Translations from the Philosophical Writings of Gottlob Frege (Oxford: Blackwell, 1952, 1960, 3rd ed. 1980b)
  • Gottlob Frege, (trans. and ed. M. Beaney), The Frege Reader (Oxford: Blackwell, 1997)
  • Neil Tennant, Anti-Realism and Logic (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1987)
  • Neil Tennant, The Taming of the True (Clarendon Press, Oxford, 1997)
  • Ludwig Wittgenstein, (ed. G. E. M. Anscombe and G. H. von Wright; trans. G. E. M. Anscombe), Zettel (Oxford: Blackwell, 1967)
  • Crispin Wright, Realism, Meaning and Truth (Oxford: Blackwell, 1987, 2nd ed. 1993)

Author Information

Benjamin Murphy
Florida State University, Panama City
U. S. A.

Gilles Deleuze (1925–1995)

DeleuzeDeleuze is a key figure in postmodern French philosophy. Considering himself an empiricist and a vitalist, his body of work, which rests upon concepts such as multiplicity, constructivism, difference, and desire, stands at a substantial remove from the main traditions of 20th century Continental thought. His thought locates him as an influential figure in present-day considerations of society, creativity and subjectivity.  Notably, within his metaphysics he favored a Spinozian concept of a plane of immanence with everything a mode of one substance, and thus on the same level of existence.  He argued, then, that there is no good and evil, but rather only relationships which are beneficial or harmful to the particular individuals.  This ethics influences his approach to society and politics, especially as he was so politically active in struggles for rights and freedoms.  Later in his career he wrote some of the more infamous texts of the period, in particular, Anti-Oedipus and A Thousand Plateaus. These texts are collaborative works with the radical psychoanalyst Félix Guattari, and they exhibit Deleuze’s social and political commitment.

Gilles Deleuze began his career with a number of idiosyncratic yet rigorous historical studies of figures outside of the Continental tradition in vogue at the time. His first book, Empirisism and Subjectivity, isa study of Hume, interpreted by Deleuze to be a radical subjectivist. Deleuze became known for writing about other philosophers with new insights and different readings, interested as he was in liberating philosophical history from the hegemony of one perspective. He wrote on Spinoza, Nietzche, Kant, Leibniz and others, including literary authors and works, cinema, and art.   Deleuze claimed that he did not write “about” art, literature, or cinema, but, rather, undertook philosophical “encounters” that led him to new concepts.  As a constructivist, he was adamant that philosophers are creators, and that each reading of philosophy, or each philosophical encounter, ought to inspire new concepts. Additionally, according to Deleuze and his concepts of difference, there is no identity, and in repetition, nothing is ever the same.  Rather, there is only difference: copies are something new, everything is constantly changing, and reality is a becoming, not a being.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. The History Of Philosophy
    1. Two Examples: Kant and Leibniz
  3. A New Empiricism
    1. Hume
    2. Spinoza
    3. Nietzsche
    4. Deleuze's Central Empiricist Concepts
  4. Difference And Repetition
    1. Difference-in-itself
    2. Contra-Hegel
    3. Repetition and Time
    4. The Image of Thought
  5. Capitalism And Schizophrenia - Deleuze And Guattari
  6. Literature, Cinema, Painting
    1. Literature
      1. Marcel Proust
      2. Leopold von Sacher-masoch
      3. Franz Kafka
    2. Cinema
    3. Painting
  7. What Is Philosophy?
    1. Early Reflections - Naturalism
    2. "What is Philosophy?" - Constructivism
  8. References and Further Reading
    1. Main texts
    2. Secondary texts
      1. Books and Collections of Essays
      2. Additional Uncollected Articles

1. Biography

Gilles Deleuze was born in the 17th arrondisment of Paris, a district that, excepting periods in his youth, he lived in for the whole of his life. He was the son of an conservative, anti-Semitic engineer, a veteran of World War I. Deleuze's brother was arrested by Germans during the Nazi occupation of France for alleged resistance activities, and died on the way to Auschwitz.

Due to his families' lack of money, Deleuze was schooled at a public school before the war. When the Germans invaded France, Deleuze was on vacation in Normandy and spent a year being schooled there. In Normandy, he was inspired by a teacher, under whose influence he read Gide, Baudelaire and others, becoming for the first time interested in his studies. In a late interview, he states that after this experience, he never had any trouble academically. After returning to Paris and finishing his high school education, Deleuze attended the Lycée Henri IV, where he did his kâgne, an intensive year of study for students of promise, in 1945, and then studied philosophy at the Sorbonne with figures such as Jean Hippolyte and Georges Canguilheim. He passed his agrégation in 1948, necessary for entry into the teaching profession, and taught in a number of high schools until 1956. In this year, he also married Denise Paul "Fanny" Grandjouan, a French translator of D.H. Lawrence. His first book, Empiricism and Subjectivity, on David Hume, was published in 1953, when he was 28.

Over the next ten years, Deleuze held a number of assistant teaching positions in French universities, publishing his important text on Nietzsche (Nietzsche and Philosophy) in 1962. It was also around this time that he met Michel Foucault, with whom he had a long and important friendship. When Foucault died, Deleuze dedicated a book-length study to his work (Foucault 1986). In 1968, Deleuze's doctoral thesis, comprising of Difference and Repetition and Expressionism in Philosophy: Spinoza were published. This was also the period of the first major incidence of pulmonary illness that would plague Deleuze for the rest of his life.

In 1969, Deleuze took up a teaching post at the 'experimental' University of Paris VII, where he taught until his retirement in 1987. In the same year, he met Félix Guattari, with whom he wrote a number of influential texts, notably the two volumes of Capitalism and Schizophrenia, Anti-Oedipus (1972) and A Thousand Plateaus (1980). These texts were considered by many (including Deleuze) to be an expression in part of the political ferment in France during May 1968. During the seventies, Deleuze was politically active in a number of causes, including membership in the Groupe d'information sur les prisons (formed, with others, by Michel Foucault), and had an engaged concern with homosexual rights and the Palestinian liberation movement.

In the eighties, Deleuze wrote a number of books on cinema (the influential studies The Movement-Image (1983) and The Time-Image (1985)) and on painting (Francis Bacon (1981)). Deleuze's final collaboration with Guattari, What is Philosophy?, was published in 1991 (Guattari died in 1992).

Deleuze's last book, a collection of essays on literature and related philosophical questions, Essays Critical and Clinical, was published in 1993. Deleuze's pulmonary illness, by 1993, had confined him quite severely, even making it difficult for him to write. He took his own life on November 4th, 1995.

2. The History Of Philosophy

Deleuze's whole intellectual trajectory can be traced by his shifting relationship to the history of philosophy. While in later years, he became quite critical of both the style of thought implied in narrow reproductions of past thinkers and the institutional pressures to think on this basis, Deleuze never lost any enthusiasm for writing books about other philosophers, if in a new way. Most of his publications contain the name of another philosopher as part of the title: Hume, Kant, Spinoza, Nietzsche, Bergson, Leibniz, Foucault.

Deleuze expresses two main problems with the traditional style and institutional location of the history of philosophy. The first concerns a politics of the tradition:

The history of philosophy has always been the agent of power in philosophy, and even in thought. It has played the repressors role: how can you think without having read Plato, Descartes, Kant and Heidegger, and so-and-so's book about them? A formidable school of intimidation which manufactures specialists in thought - but which also makes those who stay outside conform all the more to this specialism which they despise. An image of thought called philosophy has been formed historically and it effectively stops people from thinking. (D 13)

This hegemony of thought recurrently comes under attack later in Deleuze's career, notably in What is Philosophy? This criticism also sits well with a general theme throughout his writings, which is the immediate politicisation of all thought. Philosophy and its history is not separated from the fortunes of the wider world, for Deleuze, but intimately linked to it, and to the forces at work there.

The second criticism directed at the traditional style of history of philosophy, the construction of specialists and expertise, leads directly to the foremost positive aspect of Deleuze's particular method: "What we should in fact do, is stop allowing philosophers to reflect 'on' things. The philosopher creates, he doesn't reflect." (N122) And this creation, with regard to other writers, takes the form of a portrait:

The history of philosophy isn't a particularly reflective discipline. It's rather like portraiture in painting. Producing mental, conceptual portraits. As in painting, you have to create a likeness, but in a different material: the likeness is something you have to produce, rather than a way of reproducing anything (which comes down to just repeating what a philosopher says). (N 136)

Perhaps such a method does not seem extremely creative, or perhaps only in a relatively passive sense. For Deleuze, however, the history of philosophy also embraces a much more active, constructive sense. Each reading of a philosopher, an artist, a writer should be undertaken, Deleuze tells us, in order to provide an impetus for creating new concepts that do not pre-exist (DR vii).

Thus the works that Deleuze studies are seen by him as inspirational, but also as a resource, from which the philosopher can gather the concepts that seem the most useful and give them a new life, along with the force to develop new, non-preexistent concepts.

In an important sense, Deleuze's whole modus operandi is based in this revaluation of the role of other thinkers, and the means by which one can use them: each of his books either centers around one philosopher, or derives much of its texture from references to others. In any case, new concepts are derived from others' works, or old ones are recreated or 'awakened', and put to a new service.

a. Two examples: Kant and Leibniz

Deleuze's book on Kant, his third publication (1963) in general conforms with the standards of an academic philosophical study. Aside from its surprising breadth, covering as it does all three of Kant's Critiques in a slender volume, it focuses on a problem that is clearly of concern to both Kant himself and the traditional reading of his work, that of the relationship between the faculties. Deleuze himself, later reflecting on Kant's Critical Philosophy, distinguishes it from the other, more constructivist historical studies:

My book on Kant's different; I like it, I did it as a book about an enemy that tries to show how his system works, its various cogs - the tribunal of Reason, the legitimate exercises of the faculties. (N 6)

There are, however, some distinctively creative elements even to this apparently sober study, which reflect Deleuze's general interests, two in particular. In this text on Kant, these reveal themselves by way of emphasis, rather than out-and-out creation.

The first of these is his emphasis on Kant's rejections of transcendentality at key points in the Critiques, in favour of a generalised pragmatism of reason. While Deleuze himself locates in Kant the development of the concept of the transcendental at the root of modern philosophy (DR 135), he is quick to insist that, even as transcendental faculties in Kant, understanding, reason and imagination act only in an immanent fashion to achieve their own ends:

. . . the so-called transcendental method is always the determination of an immanent employment of reason, conforming to one of its interests. The Critique of Pure Reason thus condemns the transcendent employment of a speculative reason which claims to legislate by itself; the Critique of Practical Reason condemns the transcendent employment of practical reason which, instead of legislating by itself, lets itself be empirically conditioned. (KCP 36-7; cf. KCP 24-5; NP 91)

Deleuze, then, insists on the critical activity of Kant's philosophy as not only a critique of reason used wrongly, but specifies this critique in pragmatic and empiricist terms.

The second Deleuzian feature of Kant's Critical Philosophy is its insistence on the creative and affirmative nature of the Critique of Judgement. This runs counter not just to a number of Kant scholars, who suggest that the third Critique is a defected work as a result of Kant's age and decaying mental abilities when he wrote it, but also other prominent French philosophers of Deleuze's generation, notably Jean-Francois Lyotard and Jacques Derrida, who both consider this text primarily in terms of its aporetic nature.

Deleuze, to the contrary, insists on its central importance to Kant's philosophy. He argues not only that there are conflicts between the activity of the faculties, and thus between the first two Critiques, a moot point in reading Kant, but that the Critique of Judgement solves this problem (already a controversial perspective) by positing a genesis of free accord between the faculties deeper than their conflicts. Not only are the struggles between the faculties not insoluble: there is in fact an affirmative creation of a resolution that does not rely upon any transcendental faculty.

When we turn to consider a much later text, The Fold: Leibniz and the Baroque, we find Deleuze's constructivist practice of the history of philosophy developed to its fullest. This text is not only a "portrait" of Leibniz's thought, but uses concepts drawn from it, along with new concepts based in a philosophical 'take' on mathematics, art, and music, to characterise the Baroque period, and indeed vice versa. Leibniz, Deleuze argues, is the philosopher whose point of view can be best used to understand the Baroque period, and Baroque architecture, music and art give us a unique and illuminating vantage point for reading Leibniz. In fact, one of the more astonishing claims that Deleuze makes is that the one cannot be understood properly without the other:

It is impossible to understand the Leibnizian monad, and its light-mirror-point of view-interior decoration system, if we do not come to terms with these elements in Baroque architecture. (FLB 39; translation altered)

How is such a statement to be demonstrated? Instead of claiming that in fact there is an a priori link between Leibniz and the Baroque, Deleuze creates a new concept, and reads both of them through it: this is the concept of the fold. In keeping with Leibniz's theory of the monad, that the whole universe is contained within each being, like the Baroque church, Deleuze argues that the process of folding constitutes the basic unit of existence. While there are elements of the fold already in Leibniz and the architecture and art of the period, as Deleuze points out (N 157), it gains a new consistency and significance when used as a creative term in this manner. Throughout the book, and later, in Foucault, Deleuze uses the concept of the fold to describe the nature of the human subject as the outside folded in: an immanently political, social, embedded subject.

In addition, in The Fold, we see a remarkable cross-section of Deleuze's whole work, expressed in a new way through the material that he analyses. Chapters 4 and 6 give a succinct formulation of the relationship between the event and the subject (one of Deleuze's perennial interests), which leads to a new formulation of the nature of sufficient reason in line with Deleuze's concept of the virtual. We also see a return to the question of the body that he examines with Guattari in Capitalism and Schizophrenia. (FLB sec III: 'Having a body'), which reinstates the work of Leibniz on the level of the material, rather than in the realm of idealism.

Deleuze thus provides a reading of Leibniz that strikes the reader as eccentric and certainly at odds with the traditional approach, and yet which holds to both the text (in all his historical studies, Deleuze cites quite exhaustively), and to the new direction that he is working in.

3. A New Empiricism

In the English preface to the Dialogues, Deleuze writes the following:

I have always felt that I am an empiricist . . . [My empiricism] is derived from the two characteristics by which Whitehead defined empiricism: the abstract does not explain, but must itself be explained; and the aim is not to rediscover the eternal or the universal, but to find the conditions under which something new is produced (creativeness). (D vii; cf. N 88; WP 7)

One can see that such a definition of empiricism differs sharply, at least apparently, from the traditional understanding canonised by Anglo-American histories of philosophy. Such a history would have us believe that empiricism is above all the doctrine that whatever knowledge that we possess is derived from the senses and the senses alone - the well-known rejection of innate ideas. Modern views of science embrace such a doctrine, and apply it as a tool to derive facts about the physical world.

Deleuze's empiricism is both an extreme radicalisation and rejection of this sense-data model: "Empiricism is by no means . . . a simple appeal to lived experience." (DR xx; cf. PI 35). Rather, it takes a standpoint regarding the transcendental in general. Writing of Hume, he states that, We can now see the special ground of empiricism: . . . nothing is ever transcendental." (ES 24) To claim that knowledge is derived from the senses alone and not from ideas which exist in the mind prior to experience (as is argued in a long tradition from Plato to Descartes and beyond, lingering in the discourse of modern science) is indeed a rejection of a certain transcendentality of the mind, but for Deleuze, this is only the very first moment of a radical displacement of all transcendentals that is central in all of his work: questioning the supremacy of reason as the a priori privileged way of relating to the world, questioning the link between freedom and will, attempting to abolish dualisms from ontology, reinstating politics prior to Being.

To return to the citation from the Dialogues, there are two aspects of Deleuze's empiricist philosophy. The first is the rejection of all transcendentals, but the second is an active element: for Deleuze, empiricism is always about creating. In terms of philosophy, the creation par excellence is the creation of concepts: "Empiricism is by no means a reaction against concepts . . . On the contrary, it undertakes the most insane creation of concepts ever." (DR xx) This idea of philosophy as an empiricist creation of concepts, or constructivism, is taken up again in What is Philosophy?, and is present, as noted above, in all of his historical studies of philosophers.

These two facets of empiricism are throughout Deleuze's work, and it is in this sense that his claim about being such a philosopher is clearly true. Deleuze primarily developed this point of view through the texts he wrote prior to 1968, and particularly through three other philosophers, who he reads as empiricists in the sense mentioned: Hume, Spinoza and Nietzsche.

a. Hume

Deleuze's first publication, Empiricism and Subjectivity (1953) is a book about David Hume, who is generally considered the foremost and most rigorous British empiricist, according to the general 'sense-data' model described above. Deleuze, however, takes Hume to be far more radical than he is normally considered to be. While this text very carefully reads Hume's works, especially the Treatise of Human Nature, the portrait that emerges is quite strikingly idiosyncratic.

On Deleuze's account, Hume is above all a philosopher of subjectivity. His central concern is to establish the basis upon which the subject is formed. All the well-known arguments about habit, causation and miracles reveal a more profound question: if there is nothing transcendental, how are we to understand the self-aware, creative self who seems to govern the nature that he somehow has sprung up from? Deleuze argues then that the relation between human nature and nature is Hume's central concern (ES 109).

Deleuze develops this argument by asserting precisely the opposite of the traditional reading of Hume:

According to Hume, and also Kant, the principles of knowledge are not derived from experience. But in the case of Hume, nothing is transcendental, because these principles are simply principles of our nature . . . (ES 111-2)

Kant proposed transcendental operations of categories in order to make experience possible, criticising Hume for thinking that we could have unified knowledge of an empirical flux that we only passively receive. On Deleuze's reading, however, Hume did not suppose that there were no unifying processes at work, on the contrary. The difference is that for Hume, these principles are natural; they do not rely upon the postulation of a priori structures of experience.

The question of the subject is resolved by Hume, according to Deleuze, by the creation of a number of key concepts: association, belief, and the externality of relations. Association is the principle of nature which operates by establishing a relation between two things. The imagination is affected by this principle to create a new unity, which can in turn be used later on to come to conclusions about other ideas that this unity resembles, is closely related to, or seems to cause. If we consider the traditional example of the balls on a pool table, the process of association allows a subject to form a relation of causality between one ball and the next, so that the next time one ball comes into contact with another, an expectation that the second ball will move is created.

Thus Hume, for Deleuze, considers the mind to be a system of associations alone, a network of tendencies (ES 25): "We are habits, nothing but habits - the habit of saying 'I'. Perhaps there is no more striking answer to the problem of the Self." (ES x.) The mind, affected by the natural principle of association, becomes human nature, from the ground up:

Empirical subjectivity is constituted in the mind under the influence of the principles affecting it; the mind therefore does not have the characteristics of a preexisting subject. (ES 29)

These associations account not only for experience in the basic sense, but up to the highest level of social and cultural life: this is the basis for Hume's rejection of a social contract model of society (such as Hobbes'), in favour of convention alone. Morals, feelings, bodily comportment, all of these elements of subjectivity are explained, not by transcendental structures, such as Kant will propose, but the immanent activity of association.

Once this habitual structure of the self is in place, Deleuze suggests, the Humean concept of belief comes into play, which is resolutely a central part of human nature. It describes the particularly human way of going beyond the given. When we expect the sun to come up tomorrow, we do not do so because we know that it will, but because of a belief based on a habit. This in turn reverses the hierarchy of knowledge and belief, and results, for Deleuze, in a, "great conversion of theory to practice." (PI 36) Every act of belief is a practical application of habit, without any reference to an a priori ability to judge. Not only is the human being thus habitual, on Deleuze's reading, but also creative, even in the most mundane moments of life.

Finally, Deleuze insists that one of Hume's greatest contributions to modern philosophy is his insistence that all relations are external to their terms: this is the essence of Hume's anti-transcendental stance. Human nature cannot unite itself, there is no 'I' which stands before experience, but only moments of experience themselves, unattached and meaningless without any necessary relation to each other. A flash of red, a movement, a gust of wind, these elements must be externally related to each other to create the sensation of a tree in autumn. In the social world, this externality attests to the always-already interested nature of life: no relation is necessary, or governed by neutral laws, so every relation has a localised and passional motive. The ways in which habits are formed attests to the desires at the heart of our social milieu.

Subjectivity, as Deleuze describes it through his reading of Hume, is a practical, passional, empiricist concept, immediately located at the heart of the conventional, which is to say the social.

b. Spinoza

While Hume may not be a contentious name to link with a deepened empiricism, Benedict de Spinoza certainly is. Generally considered the arch-rationalist par excellence, Spinoza is most well known for the first main thesis proposed in his Ethics: that there is one substance, God or Nature, and that everything that exists is merely a modulation of this substance. His style of writing, known as the 'geometric method', is composed by propositions, proofs, and axioms. Such a point of view hardly seems consistent with a radical construction of concepts, and an essential pragmatism: and yet this is what Deleuze's interpretation of Spinoza, which has been very influential (as recent texts such as those by Geneveive Lloyd and Moira Gatens demonstrate), argues.

Spinoza is without a doubt the philosopher most praised and referred to by Deleuze, often with words that are rarely a part of philosophical writing. For example:

Spinoza is, for me, the 'prince' of philosophers. (EPS 11)

Spinoza is the Christ of philosophers, and the greatest philosophers are hardly more than apostles who distance themselves from or draw near to this mystery. (WP 60)

Spinoza: the absolute philosopher, whose Ethics is the foremost book on concepts. (N 140)

Spinoza's greatness for Deleuze comes precisely from his development of a philosophy based on the two features of empiricism discussed above. Indeed, for Deleuze, Spinoza combines the two things into one movement: a rejection of the transcendental in the action of creating a plane of absolute immanence upon which all that exists situate themselves. In more Spinozist language, we can refer to the thesis of a single substance instead of a plane of immanence; all bodies (beings) are modal expressions of the one substance (SPP 122).

But not only is The Ethics for Deleuze the creation of a plane of immanence, it is the creation of a whole regime of new concepts that revolve around the rejection of the transcendental in all spheres of life. The unity of the ontological and the ethical is crucial, for Deleuze, in understanding Spinoza, that is:

Spinoza didn't entitle his book Ontology, he's too shrewd for that, he entitles it Ethics. Which is a way of saying that, whatever the importance of my speculative propositions may be, you can only judge them at the level of the ethics that they envelope or imply [impliquer].

In short, as the title of one of Deleuze's books, Spinoza: Practical Philosophy, indicates, the Ethics is only understood when it is seen, at one and the same time, to be theoretical and practical. Deleuze considers there to be three primary theoretico-practical points in the Ethics:

The great theories of the Ethics . . . cannot be treated apart from the three practical theses concerning consciousness, values and the sad passions (SPP 28)

First of all, the illusion of consciousness. Spinoza argues that we are not the cause of our thoughts and actions, but only assume that we are based on their affects upon us. This leads to dualisms of substance (such as Descartes' mind/body split). Deleuze insists on this point because he sees Spinoza bypassing an important illusion of subjectivity: we suppose that we are causes and not effects.

The illusion of consciousness, for Spinoza a result of inadequate knowledge and sad affects, allows us to posit a transcendental consciousness supposedly free from the interventions of the world (as in Descartes). This is in fact a blind-spot which precludes us from knowing ourselves as caused, the practical meaning of which is that we deny our own 'sociality', as one mode amongst others, and the significance of the relations that we enter into, which actually determine our power to act, and our ability to experience active joy.

The second is the critique of morality. Spinoza's Ethics, for Deleuze, constitutes a rejection of the transcendent Good/Evil distinction in favour of a merely functional opposition between good and bad. Good and Evil, for Spinoza as for Lucretius and Nietzsche, are the illusions of a moralistic world-view that does nothing but reduce our power to act and encourages the experience of the sad passions (SPP 25; LS 275-8). The Ethics is for Deleuze rather an incitement to consider encounters between bodies on the basis of their relative 'goodness' for those modes that are relating. The shark enters into a good relation with salt water, which increases its power to act, but for fresh water fish, or for a rose bush, salt water only degrades the characteristic relations between the parts of the bush and threatens to destroy its existence.

So actions have no transcendental scale to be measured upon (the theological illusion), but only relative and perspectival good and bad assessments, based on specific bodies. Thus the Ethics is, for Deleuze, an 'ethology', that is, a guide to obtaining the best relations possible for bodies.

Finally, Deleuze sees in Spinoza the rejection of the sad passions. This point is linked to the last, and again closely related to Nietzsche's critique of ressentiment and slave morality. Sad passions are for Spinoza all those forces which disparage life. For Deleuze, Spinoza,

denounces all the falsifications of life, all the values in the name of which we disparage life. We do not live, we only lead a semblance of life; we can only think of how to keep from dying, and our whole life is a death worship. (SPP 26)

The hinge that this practical reading of Spinoza turns on is Deleuze's angle of approach to the Ethics. Rather than emphasising the great theoretical structures found in the first few sections, Deleuze emphasises the later part of the book (particularly part V), which consists in arguments from the point of view of individual modes. This approach puts the importance on the reality of individuals rather than form, and on the practical rather than the theoretical. In the preface to the English translation of Expressionism in Philosophy, he writes:

What interested me most in Spinoza wasn't his Substance, but the composition of finite modes . . . That is: the hope of making substance turn on finite modes, or at least of seeing in substance a plane of immanence in which finite modes operate . . ." (EPS 11)

Deleuze's reading of Spinoza has clear and profound relations with all that he wrote after 1968, especially the two volumes of Capitalism and Schizophrenia.

c. Nietzsche

Aside from Spinoza, Nietzsche is the most important philosopher for Deleuze. His name, and central concepts that he created appear almost without exception in all of Deleuze's books. It would also be accurate to say that he reads both Spinoza and Nietzsche together, one through the other, and thus highlights the profound continuity of their thought.

The most significant work that Deleuze did with Nietzsche was his highly influential study Nietzsche and Philosophy, the first book in France to systematically defend and explicate Nietzsche's work, still suspected of fascism, after the second World War. This text was and is extremely well regarded by other philosophers, including Jacques Derrida (Derrida 2001), and Pierre Klossowski, who wrote the other key French study on Nietzsche in the second half of last century (Nietzsche and the Vicious Circle, which is dedicated to Deleuze).

While Nietzsche and Philosophy does deal with Nietzsche's polemical targets, its originality and strength lies in its systematic exposition of the diagnostic elements of his thought. Indeed, one critique of this text is that it oversystematises a thinker and writer whose style of writing overtly resists such a summary approach. For Deleuze, however, it has been one of the hallmarks of bad readings of Nietzsche that they have relied upon a non-philosophical reading, either seeing him as a writer who attempts to assert other models of thought over philosopher, or, more commonly, as an obscurantist or (proto-) madman whose books have no coherence or value.

Nietzsche, for Deleuze, develops a symptomatology based on an analysis of forces that is elaborate, rigorous and systematic. He argues that Nietzsche's ontology is monist, a monism of force: "There is no quantity of reality, all reality is already a quantity of force." (NP 40) This force, in turn, is solely a force of affirmation, since it expresses only itself and itself to its fullest; that is, force says 'yes' to itself (NP 186). Deleuze's reading of Nietzsche starts from this point, and accounts for the whole of Nietzsche's critical typology of negation, sadness, reactive forces and ressentiment on this basis. The polemical basis of Nietzsche's work, for Deleuze, is directed at all that would separate force from acting on its own basis, that is, from affirming itself.

There is not one force, but many, the play and interaction of which forms the basis of existence. Deleuze argues that the many antagonistic metaphors in Nietzsche's writing should be interpreted in light of his pluralist ontology, and not as indications of some sort of psychological agressivity.

Nietzsche's ontology, then, retains the suppleness and reliance on difference while remaining monist. Thus he, for Deleuze, is characterised as an anti-transcendental thinker.

Deleuze's reading of Nietzsche demonstrates the extent to which he rejected the traditional, or dogmatic image of thought (see (4)(d) below), which relies upon a natural harmony between thinker, truth and the activity of thought. Thought does not naturally relate to truth at all, but is rather a creative act (NP xiv), an act of affect, of force on other forces: "As Nietzsche succeeded in making us understand, thought is creation, not will to truth." (WP 54) There is no room for seeing truth as abstract generality (NP 103) in Deleuze's account of Nietzsche, but rather to see truth itself as a part of regimes of force, as a matter of value, to be assessed and judged, rather than as an innate disposition (NP 108).

Once again, in Nietzsche, we are confronted with the problem of considering a philosopher who is generally considered to be quite foreign to the tradition of empiricist thought, as an empiricist. As with Spinoza, however, Deleuze's reading of Nietzsche, as he himself indicates, relies upon his characterisation of empiricist thought: as the rejection of the transcendental, both in ontology and thought, and the consequent affirmation of thought as creativity.

d. Deleuze's Central Empiricist Concepts

While Deleuze often refers to the central concepts of empiricism as classically formulated by Hume in the Treatise (association, habituation, convention etc.) (ES; LS 305-7; DR 70-3; WP 201-2), he also develops, throughout his work, a number of other key concepts which should be considered as empiricist. The most prominent of these are immanence, constructivism, and excess.

The key word throughout Deleuze's writings, as we have seen, to be found in almost all of his main texts without fail, is immanence. This term refers to a philosophy based around the empirical real, the flux of existence which has no transcendental level or inherent seperation. His last text, published a few months before his death, bore the title, "Immanence: a life . . ." (PI 25-33). Deleuze repeatedly insists that philosophy can only be done well if it approaches the immanent conditions of that which it is trying to think; this is to say that all thought, in order to have any real force, must not work by setting up trancendentals, but by creating movement and consequences:

If you're talking about establishing new forms of transcendence, new universals, restoring a reflective subject as the bearer of rights, or setting up a communicative intersubjectivity, then it's not much of a philosophical advance. People want to produce 'consensus', but consensus is an ideal that guides opinion, and has nothing to do with philosophy. (N 152; cf. 145; WP chapter 2)

Deleuze's insistence on the concept of the immanent also has an ontological sense, as we have seen in his studies of Spinoza and Nietzsche, and which returns later in works such as Difference and Repetition and Capitalism and Schizophrenia: there is only one substance, and therefore everything which exists must be considered on the same plane, the same level, and analysed by way of their relations, rather than by their essence.

Constructivism is the title that Deleuze uses to characterise the movement of thought in philosophy. This has two senses. Firstly, empiricism, immanent thought, must create movement, create concepts if it is to be philosophy and not just opinion or consensus. Deleuze and Guattari cite Nietzsche on this point: "[Philosophers] must no longer accept concepts as a gift, nor merely purify or polish them, but first make and create them, present them and make them convincing." (WP 5)

Secondly, in relation to other philosophy, Deleuze maintains that we do not just repeat what they have already said (see (2) above): "Empiricism . . . [analyses] the states of things, in such a way that non-pre-existent concepts can be extracted from them." (D vii) This constructivism, for Deleuze, holds weight in all areas of research, as he demonstrates in his studies of literature, cinema and art (see (6) below).

Constructivism, moreover, does not proceed along any predetermined lines. There is nothing that is necessary to create, for Deleuze: thought does not have a pre-given orientation (see (4)(b) below). Empiricist thought is thus always in some sense strategic (LS 17).

The concept of excess takes the place in Deleuze's thought of the transcendent. Instead of an object, a table for example, being determined and given its essence by a transcendental concept or Idea (Plato) which is directly applicable to it, or the application of a transcendental category or schema (Kant), everything that exists is exceeded by the forces which constitute it. The table does not have a for-itself, but has existence within a field or territory, which are beyond its meaning or control. Thus a table exists in a kitchen, which is part of a three-bedroom family home, which is part of a capitalist society. In addition, the table is used to eat on, linking itself with the human body, and another produced, consumable item, a hamburger. For Deleuze, one can always analyse interminably in any direction these relations of force, which always move beyond the horizon of the object in question.

For Deleuze, however, nothing is exceeded more than subjectivity. This is not a statement of ontological priority, but bears on the extreme privilege the conscious-to-self subject has had in the history of Western thought, it is certainly here that Deleuze makes his most significant use of the concept of excess. Consider, for example: "Subjectivity is determined as an effect." (ES 26). "There are no fewer things in the mind that exceed our consciousness than there are things in the body that exceed our knowledge." (SPP 18)

The point is that human forces aren't on their own enough to establish a dominant form in which man can install himself. Human forces (having an understanding, a will, an imagination and so on) have to combine with other forces: an overall form arises from this combination, but everything depends on the nature of other forces with which the human forces become linked. (N 117; cf. especially DR 254; 257-61)

While Deleuze protests that he never made a big deal out of rejecting traditional postulates like the subject (N 88), he frequently writes about the notion of the exceeded subject, from his first book on Hume and throughout his work. This in some sense locates him in the landscape of what is known as postmodern thought, along with other figures such as Jacques Derrida, Jean-Francois Lyotard and Michel Foucault.

4. Difference And Repetition

Difference and Repetition (1968) is without doubt Deleuze's most significant book in a traditional academic style, and proposes the most central of his disruptions to the canonical traditions of philosophy. However, precisely for this reason, it is also one of his most difficult books, dealing as it does with two age-old, overdetermined philosophical topics, identity and time, and with the nature of thought itself.

a. Difference-in-itself

Deleuze's main aim in Difference and Repetition is a creative elaboration of these two concepts, but it essentially precedes by way of a critique of Western philosophy. His central thesis is,

That identity not be first, that it exist as a principle but as a second principle, as a principle become; that it revolve around the Different: such would be the nature of a Copernican revolution which opens up the possibility of difference having its own concept, rather than being maintained under the domination of a concept in general already understood as identical. (DR 41)

From Plato (DR 59-63) to Heidegger (DR 64-6), Deleuze argues, difference has not been accepted on its own, but only after being understood with reference to self-identical objects, which makes difference a difference between. He attempts in this book to reverse this situation, and to understand difference-in-itself.

We can understand Deleuze's argument by way of reference to his analysis of Plato's three-tiered system of idea, copy and simulacrum (cf. LS 253-65). In order to define something such as courage, we can have reference in the end only to the Idea of Courage, an identical-to-itself, this idea containing nothing else (DR 127). Courageous acts and people can be thus judged by analogy with this Idea. There are also, however, those who only imitate courageous acts, people who use courage as a front for personal gain, for example. These acts are not copies of the courageous ideal, but rather fakes, distortions of the idea. They are not related to the Idea by way of analogy, but by changing the idea itself, making it slip. Plato frequently makes arguments based on this system, Deleuze tells us, from the Statesman (God-shepherd, King-shepherd, charlatan) to the Sophist (wisdom, philosopher, sophist) (DR 60-1; 126-8).

The philosophical tradition, beginning with Plato (although Deleuze detects some ambiguity here (eg. DR 59; TP 361)) and Aristotle, has sided with the model and the copy, and resolutely fought to exclude the simulacra from consideration, either by rejecting it as an external error (Descartes (DR 148)), or by assimilating it into a higher form, via the operation of a dialectic (Hegel (DR 263)).

While difference is subordinated to the model/copy scheme, it can only be a consideration between elements, which gives to difference a wholly negative determination, as a not-this. However, Deleuze suggests, if we turn our attention to the simulacra, the reign of the identical and of analogy is destabilised. The simulacra exists in and of itself, without grounding in or reference to a model: its existence is "unmediated" (DR 29), it is itself unmediated difference. It is for this reason that Deleuze makes his well-known claim that a true philosophy of difference must be "inverted-" or "anti-Platonism" (DR 127-8): the being of simulacra is the being of difference itself; each simulacra is its own model.

We might well ask here: what provides the unity of the different? How can we talk about the being of something that is difference itself? Deleuze's answer is that precisely there is no intrinsic ontological unity. He takes up here Nietzsche's idea that being is becoming: there is an internal self-differing within the different itself, the different differs from itself in each case. Everything that exists only becomes and never is.

Unity, Deleuze tells us, must be understood as a secondary operation (DR 41) under which difference is pressed into forms. The prominent philosophical notion he offers for such unity is time (see (4)(c) below), but later, in Anti-Oedipus, Deleuze and Guattari offer a political ontology that shows how this process of becoming is fixed into unitary formulations.

b. Contra-Hegel

Deleuze's arch-enemy in Difference and Repetition is Hegel. While this critical stance is already clearly evident in Nietzsche and Philosophy and from there throughout his work, Deleuze's revaluation of difference itself takes as its most essential form the rejection of the Hegelian dialectic, which represents the most extreme development of the logic of the identical.

The dialectic, Deleuze tells us, seems to operate with extreme differences alone, even so far as acknowledging them as the motor of history. Formed of two opposite terms, such as being and non-being, the dialectic operates by synthesising them into a new third term that preserves and overcomes the earlier opposition. Deleuze argues that this is a dead end which makes,

identity the sufficient condition for difference to exist and be thought. It is only in relation to the identical, as a function of the identical, that contradiction is the greatest difference. The intoxication and giddiness are feigned, the obscure is already clarified from the outset. Nothing shows this more than the insipid monocentrality of the circles in the Hegelian dialectic. (DR 263)

While offering a philosophical tool that sees difference at the heart of being, the process of the dialectic removes this affirmation as its most essential step.

The further consequence of this for Deleuze relates to the place of negation in Hegel's system. The dialectic, in its general movement, takes specific differences, differences-in-themselves, and negates their individual being, on the way to a "superior" unity. Deleuze argues in Difference and Repetition that this step of Hegel's mistakes ontology, history and ethics.

"Beneath the platitude of the negative lies the world of 'disparateness'" (DR 267). There is no resolution of the differences-in-themselves into a higher unity that does not fundamentally misunderstand difference. Here Deleuze is clearly recalling his Spinozist and Nietzschean ontology of a single substance that is expressed in a multiplicity of ways (cf. DR 35-42; 269): In a famous sentence, he writes: "A single voice raises the clamour of being." (DR 35)

Hegel is famous for asserting that the negating dialectic is the motor of history, proceeding towards the often-caricatured end of history and the realisation of absolute spirit. For Deleuze, history does not have a teleological element, a direction of realisation; this is only an illusion of consciousness (cf. SPP 17-22):

History progresses not by negation and the negation of negation, but by deciding problems and affirming differences. It is no less bloody and cruel as a result. Only the shadows of history live by negation . . . (DR 268)

Finally, regarding ethics, Deleuze argues that an ontology based on the negative makes of ethical affirmation a secondary, derived possibility: "The false genesis of affirmation . . .: if the truth be told, none of this would amount to much if it was not for the moral presuppositions and practical implications of such a distortion." (DR 268)

c. Repetition and Time

For Deleuze, the central stake in the consideration of repetition is time. As with difference, repetition has been subjected to the law of the identical, but also to a prior model of time: to repeat a sentence means, traditionally, to say the same thing twice, at different moments. These different moments must be themselves equal and unbiased, as if time were a flat, featureless expanse. So repetition has essentially been considered as the traditional idea of difference over time understood in a common-sense way, as a succession of moments. Deleuze asks if, given a renovated understanding of difference as in-itself, we are able to reconsider repetition also. But there is also an imperative here, since, if we are to consider difference-in-itself over time, based in the traditional logic of repetition, we once again reach the point of identity. As such, Deleuze's critique of identity must revaluate the question of time.

Deleuze's argument proceeds through three models of time, and relates the concept of repetition to each of them.

The first is time as a circle. Circular time is mythical and seasonal time, the repetition of the same after time has passed through its cardinal points. These points may be simple natural repetitions, like the sun rising daily, the movement of summer to spring, or the elements of tragedy, which Deleuze suggests operate cyclically. There is a sense of both destiny and theology in the concept of time as a circle, as a succession of instants which are governed by an external law.

When time is considered in this fashion, Deleuze argues (DR 70-9), repetition is solely concerned with habit. The subject experiences the passing of moments cyclically (the sun will come up every morning), and contracts habits which make sense of time as a continually living present. Habit is thus the passive synthesis of moments that creates a subject.

The second model of time is linked by Deleuze to Kant (KCP vii-viii), and it constitutes one of the central ruptures that the Kantian philosophy creates in thought, for Deleuze: this is time as a straight line. In the Critique of Pure Reason, Kant liberates time from the circular model by proposing it as a form that is imposed upon sensory experience. For Deleuze, this reverses the earlier situation by placing events into time (as a line), rather than seeing the chain of events constituting time by the passing of present moments.

Habit can thus no longer have any power, since in this model of time, nothing returns. In order for sense to be made of what has occurred, there must be an active process of synthesis, which makes of the past instances a meaning (DR 81). Deleuze calls this second synthesis memory. Unlike habit, memory does not relate to a present, but to a past which has never been present, since it synthesises from passing moments a form in-itself of things which never existed before the operation. The novels of Marcel Proust are for Deleuze the most profound development of memory as the pure past, or in Proust's terminology, as time regained. (DR 122; PS passim)

In this second model of time, repetition thus has an active sense in line with the synthesis, since it repeats something, in the memory, that did not exist before - this does not save it, however, from being an operation of identity, nonetheless. These two moments, the active constitution of a pure past, and the disparate experience of a present yet to be synthesised produces a further consequence for Deleuze: as in Kant, a radical splitting of the subject into two elements, the I of memory, which is only a process of synthesis, and a self of experience, an ego which undergoes experience. (DR 85-7; KCP viii-ix)

Deleuze insists that both of these models of time press repetition into the service of the identical, and make it a secondary process with regards to time. The final model of time that Deleuze proposes attempts to make repetition itself the form of time.

In order to do this, Deleuze relates the concepts of difference and repetition to each other. If difference is the essence of that which exists, constituting beings as disparates, then neither of the first two models of time does justice to them, insisting as they do on the possibility and even necessity of synthesising differences into identities. It is only when beings are repeated as something other that their disparateness is revealed. Consequently, repetition cannot be understood as a repetition of the same, and becomes liberated from subjugation under the demands of traditional philosophy.

To give body to the conception of repetition as the pure form of time, Deleuze turns to the Nietzschean concept of the eternal return. This difficult concept is always given a forceful and careful qualification by Deleuze whenever he writes about it (eg. DR 6;41; 242; PI 88-9; NP 94-100): that it must not be considered as the movement of a cycle, as the return of the identical. As a form of time, the eternal return is not the circle of habit, even on the cosmic level. This would only allow the return of something that already existed, of the same, and would result again in the suppression of difference through an inadequate concept of repetition.

While habit returned the same in each instance, and memory dealt with the creation of identity in order to allow experience to be remembered, the eternal return is, for Deleuze, only the repetition of that which differs-from-itself, or, in Nietzsche's terminology, only the repetition of those beings whose being is becoming: "The subject of the eternal return is not the same but the different, not the similar but the dissimilar, not the one but the many . . ." (DR 126)

As such, Deleuze tells us, repetition as the third meaning of time takes the form of the eternal return. Everything that exists as a unity will not return, only that which differs-from-itself. "Difference inhabits repetition." (DR 76). So, while habit was the time of the present, and memory the being of the past, repetition as the eternal return is the time of the future.

The superiority of this third understanding of repetition as time has two main impetuses in Deleuze's argument. The first is obviously that it keeps difference intact in its movement of differing-from-itself. The second is as significant, if for different reasons. If only what differs returns, then the eternal return operates selectively (DR 126; PI 88-9), and this selection is an affirmation of difference, rather than an activity of representation and unification based on the negative, as in Hegel.

d. The Image of Thought

Chapter three of Difference and Repetition provides a novel approach to an important question in philosophy, the problem of presuppositions. Deleuze pursues this topic again later in A Thousand Plateaus (374-80), and when he writes about conceptual personae in What is Philosophy? (ch. 3); he had already written on images of thought in Nietzsche and Philosophy (103-10) and Proust and Signs (94-102).

An example is Descartes' celebrated phrase at the beginning of the Discourse on the Method:

Good sense is the most evenly shared thing in the world . . the capacity to judge correctly and to distinguish the true from the false, which is properly what one calls common sense or reason, is naturally equal in all men . .

For Descartes, thought has a natural orientation towards truth, just as for Plato, the intellect is naturally drawn towards reason and recollects the true nature of that which exists. This, for Deleuze, is an image of thought.

Although images of thought take the common form of an 'Everybody knows . . .' (DR 130), they are not essentially conscious. Rather, they operate on the level of the social and the unconscious, and function, "all the more effectively in silence." (DR 167)

Deleuze undertakes a thorough analysis of the traditional philosophical image of thought, and lists eight features which, in all aspects of philosophical pursuit, imply a subordination of thought to externally imposed directives. He includes the good nature of thought, the priority of the model or recognition as the means of thought, the sovereignty of representation over supposed elements in nature and thought, and the subordination of culture to method (or learning to knowledge). These all imply an a priori nature of thought, a telos, a meaning and a logic of practice. These features,

crush thought under an image which is that of the Same and the Similar in representation, but profoundly betrays what it means to think and alienates the two powers of difference and repetition, of philosophical commencement and recommencement. (DR167)

It is this element, in Difference and Repetition, that founds Deleuze's most serious criticism of the traditional image of thought: that it fails to come to terms with the true nature of difference and repetition. As a result, it is fair to say that this moment of the book is essential for understanding the way in which Deleuze both wants to base his assessment of traditional philosophies of identity and time, and how he wishes to exceed them: his reformulation of difference and repetition is made possible by this critique (cf. N 149).

The other critical angle Deleuze supplies here is related to the first, and derives from Nietzsche's critique of Western thought:

When Nietzsche questions the most general presuppositions of philosophy, he says that these are essentially moral, since Morality alone is capable of convincing us that thought has a good nature and the thinker a good will, and that only the good can ground the supposed affinity between thought and the True. (DR132; cf. LS 3)

As we saw above regarding Hegel, the real point of concern is that this image of thought is in the service of practical, political and moral forces, it is not simply a matter of philosophy, in segregation from the rest of the world.

To the question 'why do we have this image of thought?' Deleuze, along with Nietzsche, that it is a moral image, and is in the service of power, but there is also a more intrinsic problem with thinking itself, that is only fully developed in the Conclusion to What is Philosophy?, and this is that thought itself is dangerous.

In contradistinction to the natural goodness of thought in the traditional image, Deleuze argues for thought as an encounter: "Something in the world forces us to think." (DR 139) These encounters confront us with the impotence of thought itself (DR 147), and evoke the need of thought to create in order to cope with the violence and force of these encounters. The traditional image of thought has developed, just as Nietzsche argues about the development of morality in The Genealogy of Morals, as a reaction to the threat that these encounters offer. We can consider the traditional image of thought, then, precisely as a symptom of the repression of this violence.

As a result, the relationship of philosophy to thought must have two correlative aspects, Deleuze argues:

an attack on the traditional moral image of thought, but also a movement towards understanding thought as self-engendering, an act of creation, not just of what is thought, but of thought itself, within thought (DR 147).

This is true, dangerous thought, but the sole thought capable of approaching difference-in-itself and complex repetition: thought without an image. .

The thought which is born in thought, the act of thinking which is neither given by innateness nor presupposed by reminiscence but engendered in its genitality, is a thought without image. But what is such a thought, and how does it operate in the world? (DR 167; cf. 132)

This final question directs us towards the central aim of the two texts of Capitalism and Schizophrenia.

5. Capitalism And Schizophrenia - Deleuze And Guattari

The collaborative texts of Deleuze and Felix Guattari, particularly the two volumes of Capitalism and Schizophrenia, are outside of the scope of the current article (see the Deleuze and Guattari entry in this encyclopaedia, forthcoming). However, two brief points are important to note.

First, that despite the wide notoriety of these works as obscurantist and non-philosophical, they bear a profound relation to Deleuze's philosophical enterprise in general, and develop in new ways many of his concerns: a commitment to an immanent ontology, the importance of the social and the political to the very heart of being, and the affirmation of difference over the transcendental hierarchy in every aspect of this work.

Secondly, the manner in which these texts are written by the two writers, between the two and not seperately, means that many new elements emerge that cannot be drawn from their work individually. As such, regarding Deleuze, many of the central ideas cited above do undergo an interesting and novel transformation into a new direction: the very type of relationship characterised in Capitalism and Schizophrenia as a becoming.

6. Literature, Cinema, Painting

Deleuze's work on the arts, he never ceases to remind the reader, are not to be understood as literary criticism, film or art theory. Talking of the 1980's, during which he wrote almost exclusively on the arts, he states the following:

let's suppose that there's a third period when I worked on painting and cinema: images on the face of it. But I was writing philosophy. (N 137)

This accords with the aims of Deleuze's empiricism (see (3) above), to understand philosophy as an encounter (with a work, philosophical or artistic, an object, a person) out of which "non-pre-existent concepts," (DR vii) can be created. Regarding his books on cinema, he is even more explicit:

Film criticism faces twin dangers: it shouldn't just describe films but nor should it apply to them concepts taken from outside film. The job of criticism is to form concepts that aren't of course 'given' in films but nonetheless relate specifically to cinema, and to some specific genre of film, to some specific film or other. Concepts specific to cinema, but which can only be formed philosophically. (N 58; C2 280)

All of Deleuze's work on artists can be assembled under the rubric of the creation of new philosophical concepts that relate specifically to the work at hand, yet which also link these works with others more generally. Not a philosophy of the arts per se, but a philosophical encounter with specific artistic works and forms.

One feature that the artistic works also contain, distinct from many of Deleuze's other books, is a concern with a taxonomy of signs. In Proust and Signs, Francis Bacon, and the Cinema books, Deleuze attempts to develop a systematic approach of classifying different signs. These signs are not linguistic (C1 ix), since they are not themselves elements of a system, but rather are types of emissions from a work. Proust, for example, on Deleuze's account, understands experience itself as a reception of signs by a proto-subject which must be understood properly, just as the large variety of images discussed in Cinema 1 and 2 are categorised by Deleuze on the basis of C.S. Pierce's semiotics.

Deleuze often comes to consider the questions 'what is the nature of the artist, and of art?' Aside from his specific elaborations of these questions in What is Philosophy?, he is concerned to emphasise the radically active creative nature of art and artists in his work in general. This characterisation goes far beyond the general consideration of artists as 'creative people', and highlights the manner in which art is itself a creation of movement, not of representations: that is, something radically new, an affect, a movement of force or desire (cf. PS xi.,187 n1).

While the dominant Western tradition, from Plato to Heidegger, places art in a relationship to truth, Deleuze insists in every case on a Nietzschean argument (NP 102-3), that the work of art only has relations with forces, and that truth is a derivative, secondary formation: art is active.

In another register, Deleuze suggests that artists are themselves created, within thought, and must be cultured and afflicted by forces which exceed them to develop to the point of creativity (NP 103-9; cf. (4)(d) above). These forces, in turn, account for the frequent frailty of artists and thinkers. While the work of art sets to work forces of life, the artist themselves has experienced "too much", and this wearies and sickens them (D 18; C2 189).

Deleuze's insistences that the artist is above all someone who creates new ways of being and perceiving increases in frequency and strength throughout the course of his texts on art and artists.

a. Literature

Deleuze wrote extensively on literature throughout his career. Aside from dedicating whole works to Proust (Proust and Signs 1964), Leopold von Sacher-Masoch ("Coldness and Cruelty"1969), and Kafka (Kafka: Towards a Minor Literature 1975), and a large portion of The Logic of Sense to Lewis Carroll, he also dealt in some detail with a wide range of figures such as F. Scott Fizgerald, Herman Melville, Samuel Beckett, Antonin Artaud, Heinrich von Kleist, and Fyodor Dostoyevsky.

i. Marcel Proust

It is quite easy, if one wishes to attach a philosophical point of view to Marcel Proust's work, to see it as a phenomenology of memory and perception, in which his famous text In Search of Lost Time would be oriented towards an understanding of what underlies and gives substance to experience and memory.

In essence, Deleuze proposes the opposite of the phenomenological method. He reads Proust's work as an anti-logos, that supposes, rather than a transcendental ego which is the necessary feature of all experience, a passive, receptive subject at the mercy of the signs and symptoms of the world.

For what does in fact take place in In Search of Lost Time, one and the same story with infinite variations? It is clear that the narrator sees nothing, hears nothing . . like a spider poised in its web, observing nothing, but responding to the slightest sign . . . (AO 68)

Rather than memory, the central question of the Search, being based within the subject, and as the product of certain transcendental operations, it is a creation of something which did not exist before by way of an original, each-time unique, style of interpretation for experiences (PS 101). Deleuze uses the term 'anti-logos' on the grounds that Proust, as he argues, refuses the representational model of experience central to Western philosophy:

Everywhere Proust contrasts the world of signs and symptoms with the world of attributes, the world of hieroglyphs and ideograms with the world of analytic expression, phonetic writing, and rational thought. What is constantly impugned are the great themes inherited from the Greeks: philos, sophia, dialogue, logos, phone. (PS 108)

In contrast, Deleuze characterises the Search as a recasting of thought: thought is creative and not reminiscent (Platonic and phenomenological).

ii. Leopold von Sacher-masoch

Masoch features in a few of Deleuze's books (K 66-7; D 119-23), but most significantly in his long study "Coldness and Cruelty". This early text is a critique of the unity of the clinical and aesthetic notion "sado-masochism".

Deleuze argues here that this clinical concept fails to account for the actual writings of the Maquis de Sade and Sacher-masoch, along with making an unjustified unity from a two quite distinct groups of symptoms.

Masoch is considered by Deleuze to be an important writer of unusual power, and a master of suspense, the key literary element of masochism. However, while de Sade has become well-known, and his writings analysed, Deleuze suggests that our poor understanding of Masoch's texts is one of the main culprits in making the confused unity that is sadomasochism. In fact, according to Deleuze, he offers us a new way of understanding existence by displacing sexuality into the world of power (M 12). Thus, Deleuze tells us, Masoch was in fact, "a great anthropologist." (M 16)

Point by point, Deleuze develops a reading of the two writers, Masoch in particular, that shows their profound disparity. Alongside this is an analysis of the psychiatric categories of sadism and masochism that reveals the same lack of common ground.

Sadomasochism is one of these misbegotten names, a semiological howler. We found in every case that what appeared to be a common 'sign' linking the two perversions together turned out on investigation to be in the nature of a mere syndrome which could be further broken down into irreducibly specific symptoms of the one or the other perversion. (M 134)

In "Coldness and Cruelty", Deleuze also elaborates a critique of Freud that points in the direction of Anti-Oedipus, although clearly more limited in scope.

iii. Franz Kafka

Kafka: towards a minor literature can be distinguished from Deleuze's other texts on literature in that it was written with Guattari, and it strongly bears the stamp of Anti-Oedipus, published just three years earlier, and the concepts utilised there. In many ways, it can be read as a development of the same themes in regard to Kafka's work.

This text is a marked departure from all of the dominant interpretations of Kafka's writing, which is generally considered either psychoanalytically (as a projection of interior guilt onto the world through writing) or mythically, that is, as a reserve of symbols and closely related to negative theology and Jewish mysticism. Deleuze and Guattari consider Kafka as a proponent of a joyful science, of writing as a way of creating a line of flight or freedom from the forms of domination. They write:

The three worst themes in many interpretations of Kafka are the transcendence of the law, the interiority of guilt, the subjectivity of enunciation. (K 45)

In contrast, Deleuze and Guattari read Kafka as a proponent of the immanence of desire. The law is no more than a secondary configuration that traps desire into certain formations: bureaucracy, of course, is the main example in Kafka's work, where offices, secretaries, lawyers and bankers present figures of entrapment.

They also see Kafka as directly targeting the Oedipus complex, the triangle of "daddy-mommy-me":

the too-well formed family triangle is really only a conduit for investments of an entirely different sort that the child endlessly discovers underneath his father, inside his mother, in himself. The judges, commissioners, bureaucrats, and so on, are not substitutes for the father; rather, it is the father who is a condensation of all these forces that he submits to and that he tries to get his son to submit to. (K 11-2)

Thus, for Kafka, according to Deleuze and Guattari, the family are a socially derived unit that works by trapping the flow of desire. The interiority of guilt is replaced by the exteriority of subjugation. This is best demonstrated in the analysis of Kafka's famous short story, The Metamorphosis (K 14-5).

They also wish to read Kafka, not as a writer of genius, who expresses the superior insight of his inner sight, but as a writer of minor literature. This is the key concept of Deleuze and Guattari's reading of Kafka. Minor literature is a writing that takes a dominant language (German, in Kafka's case, French in Beckett's, and so forth), and pushes it until it becomes a language of force, and not of signification (K 19). In turn, this connects immediately with the situation of minorities, minority groups in the first instance, but also the attempts that everyone makes to create a line of flight outside of majoritarian or molar social formations.

As such, minor literature is an immediately political writing (K 17), which connects the text immediately to (micro-) political struggle. Thus the third substitution is the collective, that is, political, nature of enunciation, for the traditional model of the subjective intent behind the author's words. Kafka, for Deleuze and Guattari, writes as a node in a field of forces, rather than a Cartesian cogito, sovereign in the castle of consciousness. "The superiority of Anglo-american literature"

One clear feature of Deleuze's relationship to literature is his outspoken appreciation for what he calls Anglo-American literature, and its superiority over the literature of Europe.

What we find in great English and American novelists is a gift, rare among the French, for intensities, flows, machine-books, tool-books, schizo-books. (N 23)

The great European tradition in literature is analogous for Deleuze to traditional philosophy: it always revolves around a relationship to truth, the preservation of some kind of social status quo, the sovereignty of the author over the text; as Deleuze states, "everybody says "cogito" in the French novel."

The strength of Anglo-american literature for Deleuze is rather that it rejects the idea of the book as a representation of reality, and all of the adjacent problems with the dogmatic image of literature, and presents the book as a machine, as something which does things, rather than signifying.

b. Cinema

Part of the reason for the impact of Deleuze's writings on cinema is simply that he is the first important philosopher to have devoted such detailed attention to it. Of course, many philosophers have written about movies, but Deleuze offers an analysis of the cinema itself as an artistic form, and develops a number of connections between it and other philosophical work.

Deleuze's first book is entitled Cinema 1: The Movement-Image. It deals with cinema from its development through to the second World War. For Deleuze, the cinema as an art form is quite unique, and deals with its subject matter in ways that no other form of art is capable of, particularly as a way of relating to the experience of space and time.

Deleuze's analysis begins by coming to new understandings of the concepts of the image and movement. The image, above all, is not a representation of something, that is, a linguistic sign. This definition relies upon the age-old Platonic distinction between form and matter, in its modern Saussurean form of signifier-signified. Rather, Deleuze wants to collapse these two orders into one, and the image thus becomes expressive and affective: not an image of a body, but the body as image (C1 58).

This collapse comes about with reference to two philosophers, Henri Bergson and Charles Sanders Pierce. Deleuze dedicated a book-length study to the former entitled Bergsonism (1968), and his use of his notions of movement and time in the Cinema texts is already presaged by this text. Movement for Bergson, Deleuze argues, is not separable from the object which moves: they are literally the same thing. Thus, no representative relationship can be established without artificially halting the flow of movement and thus misconstruing the frozen 'element' as self-sufficient. There is only the flow of movement which expresses itself in different ways. Among other things, this is one of Deleuze's critiques of phenomenology (C1 56, 60). Thus the early cinema is characterised for Deleuze by the reign of what he calls the sensory-motor schema. This schema is the unity of the viewed and the eye that views in dynamic movement.

This model of the movement-image is precisely the nature of cinema, for Deleuze. It does not falsify movement by extracting segments and stringing them together in a representative fashion, but creates a wide range of expressive images. It is in order to come to terms with the varieties of movement-images that Deleuze turns to Pierce, who developed, "the most extraordinary classifications of images and signs . . ." (C2 30). The main part of Cinema 1 is thus devoted to using, with some alterations, Pierce's semiotic classifications to describe the use of movement-images in cinema, and their centrality before the second World War.

The movement from the first text to Cinema 2: The Time-Image has a significance closely related to Kant's so-called Copernican revolution in philosophy. Up until Kant, time was subject to the events that took place within it, time was a time of seasons and habitual repetition (see (3)(c) above); it was not able to be considered on its own, but as a measure of movement (C2 34-5; KCP iv.). One element of Kant's achievement for Deleuze, as we have seen, is his reversal of the time-movement relationship: he establishes time itself as an element to which movement must be subordinated, a pure time.

In the cinema, Deleuze argues, a similar reversal takes place. The historico-cultural reason behind this reversal is the event of World War two itself. With the great truths of Western culture put so deeply in question by the before unimaginable methods employed and their forthcoming results, the sensory-motor apparatus of the movement-image are made to tremble before the unbearable, the too-much of life's possibilities, the potential of the present (C2 35). No longer could the dogmatic truths that had guided society, and cinema to an extent, allow the apparently 'natural' movement from one thing to the next in an habitual fashion: 'natural' links precisely lost their efficacy. And with the use of unnatural or false links, which do not follow the sequence or narrative affect of the movement-image, time itself, the time-image, is manifested in cinema (Deleuze considers Orson Welles to be the first auteur to make use of the time-image (C2 137)). Rather than finding time as an, "indirect representation," (C2 35-6), the viewer experiences the movement of time itself, which images, scenes, plots and characters presuppose or manifest in order to gain any sort of movement whatsoever.

Along with this 'external' reason, there is also for Deleuze a motivation within cinema itself to go from the movement-image to the time-image. The movement image has the tendency, thanks to the habitual experience of movement as normal and centered, to justify itself in relation to truth: as Deleuze argues with regard to the dogmatic image of thought (see (3)(d) above), there is the presupposition that thought naturally moves towards truth. Of course, Deleuze suggests, cinema, when truly creative, never relied upon this presupposition, and yet, "the movement-image, in its very essence, is answerable to the effect of truth which it invokes while movement preserves its centres." (C2 142). In questioning its own presuppositions, Deleuze argues, cinema moved towards a new, different, way of understanding movement itself, as subordinate to time.

This in turn leads Deleuze to abandon Pierce's semiotics to a large degree, since it has no room for the time-image (C2 33-4ff.), and replaces him with Nietzsche. As we have seen in our consideration of time in Difference and Repetition (see (3)(c) above), Nietzsche is the philosopher who Deleuze considers to have made the crucial move with regard to time, surpassing even Kant.

One of the central consequences for cinema that this move from movement-image to time-image makes again highlights one of Deleuze's central concerns, to establish an ontology and a semiology of force: "What remains? There remain bodies, which are forces, nothing but forces." (C2 139) Since the cinema of the time-image is concerned to liberate images from carrying or implying time in order to form narrative (no less than liberating time itself from narrative), images are themselves free now to express forces, "shocks of force," (C2 139). Scenes, movements and language become expressive rather than representative.

c. Painting

Deleuze's central work in the visual arts is his monograph Francis Bacon: logique de la sensation (the logic of sensation), but he also engages with a large number of other figures in various texts (eg. TP 492-500; WP ch.7), such as Turner (AO 132), Van Gogh, Klee, Kandinsky and Cezanne.

Deleuze's book on Francis Bacon, as the title suggests, is an attempt to construct a logic of sensations from the artist's work (FB 7). This task is largely a taxonomic one. Deleuze develops, throughout the book, a number of key categorial notions and new concepts that allow him to move away from the standard representational view of painting, towards a painting of force, that presents force and creates affects (sensations) rather than representing or describing a scene. Three central ideas are at work.

The first is an elaboration of the concept of Figure. For Deleuze, while the idea of figuration in painting has largely been representational, he sees Bacon, and to some extent Cezanne before him (FB 40, 76), collapsing the Figure into the world of forces, placing it in a new relation to force. Thus Bacon's cries, for which he is famous, place the figure in the presence of force: ". . . painting will place the visible cry, the mouth which cries, into a relation with force." (FB 41). For Deleuze the cry expresses an extreme moment of life, rather than suffering or horror. As with Kafka, Deleuze takes Bacon's artistic work, is commonly considered very dark and nihilistic, and considers it as a true sign of life, and of struggle with death.

The second, a refrain familiar from all of his work, relates to a notion of force that makes it ontologically and artistically fundamental rather than politically oppressive, much as desire is reconfigured in Capitalism and Schizophrenia. It is in fact this move that allows Deleuze's general 'positivism' towards Bacon, as we have just seen: "Everything . . . is in relation with forces, everything is force." (FB 40) In Francis Bacon, Deleuze thus creates the notion of 'color-force', in order to understand how color can be expressive of force rather than representative (FB 94-7).

Finally, Deleuze draws on the difference between Western, representational models of vision, and the haptic style of Egyptian art, in which he sees a development of a mode of writing/drawing which resists being hypostased into the content/form duality common to philosophical understandings of art.

7. What Is Philosophy?

We have already seen the significance of empiricism for Deleuze's philosophy ((3) above). Throughout his work, however, Deleuze gives a number of further formulations concerning the aim and nature of philosophy. These can be understood in two phases, an early critical naturalism and a later vitalist constructivism.

a. Early reflections - Naturalism

In his early works in the history of philosophy, culminating with The Logic of Sense, Deleuze expresses an essentially critical model of philosophy. In his book on Nietzsche, he writes:

When someone asks 'what's the use of philosophy?' the reply must be aggressive, since the question tries to be ironic and caustic. Philosophy does not serve the State or the Church, who have other concerns. It serves no established power. The use of philosophy is to sadden. A philosophy which saddens no one, that annoys no one, is not a philosophy. It is useful for harming stupidity, for turning stupidity into something shameful. Its only use is the exposure of all forms of baseness of thought. . . . Philosophy is at its most positive as a critique, as an enterprise of demystification. (NP 106)

It seems that this is the sole moment in Deleuze's published work where he uses the term 'sadden' in a positive manner, as something desirable, and this is an indication of the strength by which he considers philosophy, in this early sense, as an exercise in naturalism in the sense that Lucretius uses this term, that is, as an attack on all forms of mystification. Commenting on Lucretius, Deleuze makes the following, extremely similar, remark:

The speculative object and the practical object of philosophy as Naturalism, science and pleasure, coincide on this point: it is always a matter of denouncing the illusion, the false infinite, the infinity of religion and all of the theologico-erotic-oneiric myths in which it is expressed. To the question 'what is the use of philosophy?' the answer must be: what other object would have an interest in holding forth the image of a free man, and in denouncing all of the forces which need myth and troubled spirit in order to establish their power? (LS 278)

Deleuze's philosophical naturalism is thus critical, Spinozist and Nietzschean: it sets as the aim of philosophy the attack of all that belittles life: the sad passions of Spinoza, the passive and reactive forces of Nietzsche, and mythology, in Lucretian terms. Naturalism must not here be understood as opposed to a cosmopolitanism, or constructivism, Deleuze tells us. Rather, "Naturalism . . . directs its attack against the prestige of the negative; it deprives the negative of all of its power; it refuses the spirit of the negative the right to speak in the name of philosophy." (LS 279)

Mythology, in the sense of these texts, is the eternal danger for the operation of thought. Deleuze summarises this immanent threat within thought (cf. (4)(d) above) as the threat of stupidity:

Philosophy could have taken up the problem with its own means and with the necessary modesty, by considering the fact that stupidity is never that of others but the object of a properly transcendental question: how is stupidity [...] possible? (DR 151)

b. "What is Philosophy?" - constructivism

From Difference and Repetition onwards, Deleuze, while maintaining this critical aspect for philosophy, develops a thorough-going constructivist view which manifests itself in the final collaboration between Deleuze and Guattari, What is Philosophy? This text involves arguments about three central notions: the creation of concepts, the presuppositions of philosophy, and the relations between philosophy, science and art.

As we have seen, a certain doctrine of empiricist constructivism runs through Deleuze's work from the beginning, and on a number of levels. In What is Philosophy? this becomes the central and explicit theme: "philosophy is the art of forming, inventing, and fabricating concepts". (WP 2)

The philosopher's only business is concepts, Deleuze and Guattari tell us, and the concept belongs only to philosophy (WP 34). This is already clear when we consider Deleuze's writings on the arts, which he considers to be philosophical (see (6) above).

The fortunes of the concept, due to lack of attention by philosophers, have fallen, to the point at which even marketing has taken hold of it, in, "the general movement that replaced Critique with sales promotion." (WP 10) However, Deleuze and Guattari insist, philosophy still only has meaning vis a vis the concept.

A concept is distinctly featured. It is a multiplicity, not in itself a single thing, but an assemblage of components which must retain coherence with the others for the concept to remain itself (in this sense, it closely resembles the Spinozist body). These components are singularities: "'a' possible world, 'a' face, 'some' words . . ." (WP 20), and yet become indiscernible when a part of a concept. Each concept also has a relationship to other concepts by way of the similar problems that they address, and by having similar component elements, and Deleuze and Guattari describe their relations by the use of the term vibration (WP 23).

Above all, however, the concept must not be confused with the proposition, as in logic (WP 135 ff.), which is to say that it is agrammatical. There is no necessary relation between concepts, nor is there any given way of relating. The logical functions of either/or, both/and and so forth, do not do justice to the each-time created nature of conceptual relations. Neither does the concept have a reference, in the way that a proposition does. Rather, it is intensive and expresses the virtual existence of an event in thought: consider Descartes' famous cogito, which expresses the virtual individual in relation to themselves and the world.

Finally, a concept has no relationship to truth, which is an external determination, or presupposition, that places thought at the service of the dogmatic image of thought: "The concept is a form or a force" (WP 144). As such, concepts act, they are affective, rather than significatory, or expressive of the contents of ideas.

The question of presuppositions, already dealt with via the concept of the image of thought (see (4)(d) above), is examined in much greater depth by Deleuze and Guattari in What is Philosophy? Indeed, their answer involves two new concepts, the conceptual personae, and the plane of immanence.

Conceptual personae (WP ch. 3) are the figures of thought that give concepts their specific force, their raison d'être. They are to be confused with neither psycho-social types (WP 67), nor with the philosophers themselves (WP 64), but are like concepts created. Deleuze and Guattari argue that conceptual personae, while often only implicit in philosophy, are decisive for understanding the significance of concepts. To take again Descartes' cogito, the implicit conceptual persona is the idiot, the regular person, uneducated, untrained in philosophy, potentially betrayed by their senses at every turn, and yet, able to have perfectly clear and distinct knowledge of themselves, through the certainty of the 'I think, therefore I am'. Also mentioned are Nietzsche's famous personae, both sympathetic and anti-pathetic: Zarathustra, the last man, Dionysus, the Crucified, Socrates, and so forth. (WP 64)

Conceptual personae are, for Deleuze and Guattari, internal, non-philosophical preconditions for the practice of creating concepts. These personae, in turn, are related to the plane of immanence. This concept has clear and significant resonances with other important elements of Deleuze's thought, above all with his monist ontology of forces, and with his practical emphasis on Nietzsche and Spinoza's ethics as non-transcendental.

The plane of immanence (WP ch. 2) in thought is opposed to the transcendent in traditional philosophy. Each time that a transcendent is raised (Descartes' cogito, Plato's ideas, Kant's categories), thought is arrested, and philosophy is placed at the service of dominant ideas. For Deleuze and Guattari, all of these instances of the transcendental stem from the same problem: insisting that immanence be immanent to "something". (WP 44-5)

For thought to exist, for concepts to be formed and then given body through conceptual personae, they must operate immanently, without the rule of a "Something" that organises or stratifies the plane of immanence. Concepts exist on the plane of immanence, and each philosopher, Deleuze and Guattari tell us, must create such a plane.

The other main concern of What is Philosophy? is to come to an understanding of the relations between philosophy, art and science respectively. Deleuze and Guattari argue that each discipline involves the activity of thought, and that in each case it is a matter of creation. What differs is the sphere of creation and the manner in which it is populated.

Art is concerned with the creation of percepts and affects (WP 164), which are together sensation. Percepts are not perceptions, in that they do not refer to a perceiver, and neither are affects the feelings or affections of someone. Just as we saw with concepts, affects and percepts are independent beings which exist outside of the experience of a thinker, and have no reference to a state of affairs. Deleuze and Guattari write: "The work of art is a being of sensation and nothing else: it exists in itself." (WP 164) The correlate of the conceptual persona in art is the figure (which is investigated in great depth in Deleuze's text on Bacon, see (6)(c) above), and for the plane of immanence, art is created on the plane of composition, which is likewise immanent only to itself, and populated with the pure forces of percepts and affects (WP 196).

The situation with science is similar. Science is the activity of thought that creates functions. These functions, in contrast to concepts, are propositional (WP 117), and form the fragments from which science is able to piece together a kind of makeshift language, one which however, does not have any prior relation to truth, any more than philosophy does. Functions have meaning in creating a referential point of view, for Deleuze and Guattari, that is, in creating a basis from which things can be measured. As such, the first great functions are those such as absolute zero Kelvin, the speed of light etc., in relation to which a plane of reference is assumed. The plane of reference, again immanent to the functions that populate it, gains consistency through the strength and effectiveness of its functions. Also presupposed by science, in What is Philosophy?, are partial observers, the scientific counterpart of conceptual personae and artistic figures.

The figure of the partial observer in science, as in philosophy, is frequently implicit, and exists to give direction to functions: we could consider Gallileo as an example, whose functions regarding cosmology relate to a plane of reference that gives a greater consistency to the functions that the previous planes, which often relied upon a religious transcendental structure that damaged and made scientific thinking difficult by imposing a moral image of thought. The partial observer in this case would be a figure that makes certain functions in particular take shape and gain force regarding a certain phenomena, such as the relation of the sun to the moon: the heliocentrist.

8. References and Further Reading

a. Main texts

Below is a list of Deleuze's main works, in order of their original publication in French. Francis Bacon: logique de la sensation is currently the only major work without a complete English translation, although one is currently being completed, and should be expected shortly. Indicated in parentheses after the original publication date are the initials by which each text is referred to above. In addition to the following, another resources seem particularly useful to those not familiar with Deleuze: a long three-part interview conducted with Claire Parnet, L'Abécédaire de Gilles Deleuze. Parnet suggests a topic for each letter of the alphabet, and Deleuze's answers, in most cases, are both substantial and revealing. The video set is available to purchase in French.

  • Empiricism and Subjectivity (1953 ES) trans. Constanine Boundas (1991: Columbia University Press, New York)
  • Nietzsche and Philosophy (1962 NP) trans. Hugh Tomlinson (1983: Althone Press, London)
  • Kant's Critical Philosophy (1963 KCP) trans. Hugh Tomlinson and Barbara Habberjam (1983: Althone Press, London)
  • Proust and Signs (1964 PS) trans. Richard Howard (2000: University of Minnesota Press, Minneapolis)
  • "Coldness and Cruelty" in Masochism (1967 M) trans. Charles Stivale (1989: Zone Books, New York)
  • Bergsonism (1968 B) trans. Hugh Tomlinson and Barbera Habberjam (1988: Zone Books, New York)
  • Difference and Repetition (1968 DR) trans. Paul Patton (1994: Colombia University Press, New York)
  • Expressionism in Philosophy: Spinoza (1968 EPS) trans. Martin Joughin (1990: Zone Books, New York)
  • The Logic of Sense (1969 LS) trans. Mark Lester and Charles Stivale (1990: Columbia University Press, New York)
  • Spinoza: Practical Philosophy (1970 SPP) trans. Robert Hurley (1988: City Light Books, San Francisco)
  • (with Guattari) Anti-Oedipus - Capitalism and Schizophrenia (1972 AO) trans. Robert Hurley, Mark Seem, and Helen Lane (1977: Viking Press, New York)
  • (with Guattari) Kafka: Towards a Minor Literature (1975 K) trans. Dana Polan (1986: University of Minnesota Press, Minnesota)
  • (with Claire Parnet) Dialogues (1977 D) trans. Hugh Tomlinson and Barbera Habberjam (1987: Althone Press, London)
  • (with Guattari) A Thousand Plateaus - Capitalism and Schizophrenia (1980 TP) trans. Brian Massumi (1987: University of Minnesota Press, Minneapolis)
  • Francis Bacon: logique de la sensation (1981 FB: Éditions de la différence, Paris)
  • Cinema: The Movement Image (1983 C1) trans. Hugh Tomlinson and Barbera Habberjam (1989: University of Minnesota Press, Minnesota)
  • The Time Image (1985 C2) trans. Hugh Tomlinson and Robert Galeta (1989: University of Minnesota Press, Minnesota)
  • Foucault (1986 F) trans. Sean Hand (1988: University of Minnesota Press, Minneapolis)
  • The Fold: Leibniz and the Baroque (1988 FLB) trans. Tom Conley (1993: University of Minnesota Press, Minneapolis)
  • Negotiations (1990 N) trans. Martin Joughin (1995: Columbia University Press, New York)
  • (with Guattari) What is Philosophy? (1991 WP) trans. Hugh Tomlinson and Graham Burchell (1994: Columbia University Press, New York)
  • Essays Critical and Clinical (1993) trans. Smith and Greco (1997: University of Minnesota Press, Minneapolis)
  • Pure Immanence: Essays on a life ed. John Rajchman trans. Anne Boymen (2001 PI: Zone Books, New York)

b. Secondary texts

A good text that deals systematically with the whole body of Deleuze's work, that is also quite easy to read, is the Rajchman volume. Regarding Capitalism and Schizophrenia, there are a number of commentaries available; the Massumi text is perhaps the best known and most consistent, although the general level of all secondary texts in this area is very difficult. The Clamour of Being, by Alain Baidou is a controversial interpretation of Deleuze's work, particularly his ontology, from the perspective of another important French philosopher who knew Deleuze. Michel Foucault's 1977 article, "Theatricum Philosophicum," is also a significant and well-known interpretation of Difference and Repetition and The Logic of Sense.

i. Books and Collections of Essays

  • Ansell-Pearson ed., Deleuze and Philosophy: the difference engineer (1997: Routledge, New York) - chapters 2-5, 6, 7 and 13 especially
  • Badiou, Alain Deleuze: the Clamour of Being trans. Louise Burchill (2000: University of Minnesota Press, Minneapolis)
  • Boundas and Olkowski eds., Gilles Deleuze and the Theatre of Philosophy (1994: Routledge, New York)
  • Buchanan and Colebrook eds., Deleuze and Feminist Theory (2000: Edinburgh University Press, Edinburgh)
  • Hardt, Michael Gilles Deleuze: an apprenticeship in philosophy (1993: University of Minnesota Press, Minneapolis)
  • Lecercle, J. Philosophy through the Looking-Glass: Language, Nonsense, Desire (1985: Hutchinson Press, London)
  • Marks, John Gilles Deleuze: Vitalism and Multiplicity (1998: Pluto Press, London)
  • Massumi, Brian A User's Guide to Capitalism and Schizophrenia - deviations from Deleuze and Guattari (1992: MIT Press, Cambridge)
  • Patton, Paul Deleuze and the Political (2000: Routledge, New York)
  • Rajchman, John The Deleuze Connections (2000: MIT Press, Cambridge)

ii. Additional Uncollected Articles

  • Braidotti, Rosi "Embodiment, Sexual Difference, and the Nomadic Subject" in Hypatia vol 8, no 1 pp 1-13 (Winter 1993)
  • Derrida, Jacques "I'm going to have to wander all alone" in Brault and Nass eds., The Work of Mourning pp192-5 (2001: University of Chicago Press, Chicago)
  • Eribon, Didier "Sickness unto life - the life and works of Gilles Deleuze" Artforum, v34 n7 (March 1996)
  • Foucault, Michel "Theatrum Philosophicum" in Language, Counter-memory, Practice trans. Donald Bouchard and Sherry Simon pp 165-198 (1977: Cornell University Press, Ithaca)
  • Goulimari, Pelagia "A minoritarian feminism? Things to do with Deleuze and Guattari" Hypatia v14 i2 pp97-9 (Spring 1999)
  • Neil, David "The Uses of Anachronism: Deleuze's History of the Subject" Philosophy Today 4: 42 Winter pp 418-31 (1998)

Author Information

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Ralph Waldo Emerson (1803—1882)

emersonIn his lifetime, Ralph Waldo Emerson became the most widely known man of letters in America, establishing himself as a prolific poet, essayist, popular lecturer, and an advocate of social reforms who was nevertheless suspicious of reform and reformers. Emerson achieved some reputation with his verse, corresponded with many of the leading intellectual and artistic figures of his day, and during an off and on again career as a Unitarian minister, delivered and later published a number of controversial sermons. Emerson’s enduring reputation, however, is as a philosopher, an aphoristic writer (like Friedrich Nietzsche) and a quintessentially American thinker whose championing of the American Transcendental movement and influence on Walt Whitman, Henry David Thoreau, William James, and others would alone secure him a prominent place in American cultural history. Transcendentalism in America, of which Emerson was the leading figure, resembled British Romanticism in its precept that a fundamental continuity exists between man, nature, and God, or the divine. What is beyond nature is revealed through nature; nature is itself a symbol, or an indication of a deeper reality, in Emerson’s philosophy. Matter and spirit are not opposed but reflect a critical unity of experience. Emerson is often characterized as an idealist philosopher and indeed used the term himself of his philosophy, explaining it simply as a recognition that plan always precedes action. For Emerson, all things exist in a ceaseless flow of change, and “being” is the subject of constant metamorphosis. Later developments in his thinking shifted the emphasis from unity to the balance of opposites: power and form, identity and variety, intellect and fate. Emerson remained throughout his lifetime the champion of the individual and a believer in the primacy of the individual’s experience. In the individual can be discovered all truths, all experience. For the individual, the religious experience must be direct and unmediated by texts, traditions, or personality. Central to defining Emerson’s contribution to American thought is his emphasis on non-conformity that had so profound an effect on Thoreau. Self-reliance and independence of thought are fundamental to Emerson’s perspective in that they are the practical expressions of the central relation between the self and the infinite. To trust oneself and follow our inner promptings corresponds to the highest degree of consciousness.

Emerson concurred with the German poet and philosopher Johann Wolfgang von Goethe that originality was essentially a matter of reassembling elements drawn from other sources. Not surprisingly, some of Emerson’s key ideas are popularizations of both European as well as Eastern thought. From Goethe, Emerson also drew the notion of “bildung,” or development, calling it the central purpose of human existence. From the English Romantic poet and critic Samuel Taylor Coleridge, Emerson borrowed his conception of “Reason,” which consists of acts of perception, insight, recognition, and cognition. The concepts of “unity” and “flux” that are critical to his early thought and never fully depart from his philosophy are basic to Buddhism: indeed, Emerson said, perhaps ironically, that “the Buddhist . . . is a Transcendentalist.” From his friend the social philosopher Margaret Fuller, Emerson acquired the perspective that ideas are in fact ideas of particular persons, an observation he would expand into his more general—and more famous—contention that history is biography.

On the other hand, Emerson’s work possesses deep original strains that influenced other major philosophers of the nineteenth and twentieth centuries. The German philosopher Friedrich Nietzsche read Emerson in German translations and his developing philosophy of the great man is clearly influenced and confirmed by the contact. Writing about the Greek philosopher Plato, Emerson asserted that “Every book is a quotation . . . and every man is a quotation,” a perspective that foreshadows the work of French Structuralist philosopher Roland Barthes. Emerson also anticipates the key Poststructuralist concept of différance found in the work of Jacques Derrida and Jacques Lacan—“It is the same among men and women, as among the silent trees; always a referred existence, an absence, never a presence and satisfaction.” While not progressive on the subject of race by modern standards, Emerson observed that the differences among a particular race are greater than the differences between the races, a view compatible with the social constructivist theory of race found in the work of contemporary philosophers like Kwame Appiah.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Major Works
  3. Legacy
  4. References and Further Reading

1. Biography

Ralph Waldo Emerson was born on May 25, 1803, in Boston to Ruth Haskins Emerson and William Emerson, pastor of Boston's First Church. The cultural milieu of Boston at the turn of the nineteenth century would increasingly be marked by the conflict between its older conservative values and the radical reform movements and social idealists that emerged in the decades leading up through the 1840s. Emerson was one of five surviving sons who formed a supportive brotherhood, the financial and emotional leadership of which he was increasingly forced to assume over the years. "Waldo," as Emerson was called, entered Harvard at age fourteen, taught in the summer, waited tables, and with his brother Edward, wrote papers for other students to pay his expenses. Graduating in the middle of his class, Emerson taught in his brother William's school until 1825 when he entered the Divinity School at Harvard. The pattern of Emerson's intellectual life was shaped in these early years by the range and depth of his extracurricular reading in history, literature, philosophy, and religion, the extent of which took a severe toll on his eyesight and health. Equally important to his intellectual development was the influence of his paternal aunt Mary Moody Emerson. Though she wrote primarily on religious subjects, Mary Moody Emerson set an example for Emerson and his brothers with her wide reading in every branch of knowledge and her stubborn insistence that they form opinions on all of the issues of the day. Mary Moody Emerson was at the same time passionately orthodox in religion and a lover of controversy, an original thinker tending to a mysticism that was a precursor to her nephew's more radical beliefs. His aunt's influence waned as he developed away from her strict orthodoxy, but her relentless intellectual energy and combative individualism left a permanent stamp on Emerson as a thinker.

In 1829, he accepted a call to serve as junior pastor at Boston's Second Church, serving only until 1832 when he resigned at least in part over his objections to the validity of the Lord's Supper. Emerson would in 1835 refuse a call as minister to East Lexington Church but did preach there regularly until 1839. In 1830, Emerson married Ellen Tucker who died the following year of tuberculosis. Emerson married again in 1835 to Lydia Jackson. Together they had four children, the eldest of whom, Waldo, died at the age of five, an event that left deep scars on the couple and altered Emerson's outlook on the redemptive value of suffering. Emerson’s first book Nature was published anonymously in 1836 and at Emerson's own expense. In 1837 Emerson delivered his famous "American Scholar" lecture as the Phi Beta Kappa address at Harvard, but his controversial Harvard Divinity School address, delivered in 1838, was the occasion of a twenty-nine year breach with the university and signaled his divergence from even the liberal theological currents of Cambridge. Compelled by financial necessity to undertake a career on the lecture circuit, Emerson began lecturing in earnest in 1839 and kept a demanding public schedule until 1872. While providing Emerson's growing family and array of dependents with a steady income, the lecture tours heightened public awareness of Emerson's ideas and work. From 1840-1844, Emerson edited The Dial with Margaret Fuller. Essays: First Series was published in 1841, followed by Essays: Second Series in 1844, the two volumes most responsible for Emerson's reputation as a philosopher. In 1844, Emerson also purchased the land on the shore of Walden Pond where he was to allow the naturalist and philosopher Henry David Thoreau to build a cabin the following year. While sympathetic to the experimental collective at Brook Farm, Emerson declined urgent appeals to join the group and maintained his own household in Concord with Lydia and their growing family. Emerson attempted to create his own community of kindred spirits, however, assembling in the neighborhood of Concord a group of writers including Thoreau, Nathaniel Hawthorne, the social thinker Margaret Fuller, the reformer Bronson Alcott, and the poet Ellery Channing. English Traits was inspired by a trip to Britain during 1847-1848. By the 1850s, Emerson was an outspoken advocate of abolition in lectures across New England and the Midwest and continued lecturing widely on a number of different topics—eighty lectures in 1867 alone. Emerson spent the final years of his life peacefully but without full use of his faculties. He died of pneumonia in 1882 at his home in Concord.

2. Major Works

As a philosopher, Emerson primarily makes use of two forms, the essay and the public address or lecture. His career began, however, with a short book, Nature, published anonymously in 1836. Nature touches on many of the ideas to which he would return to again and again over his lifetime, most significantly the perspective that nature serves as an intermediary between human experience and what lies beyond nature. Emerson expresses a similar idea in his claim that spirit puts forth nature through us, exemplary of which is the famous "transparent eye-ball" passage, in which he writes that on a particular evening, while “crossing a bare common . . . the currents of Universal Being circulate through me." On the strength this passage alone, Nature has been widely viewed as a defining text of Transcendentalism, praised and satirized for the same qualities. Emerson invokes the "transparent eye-ball" to describe the loss of individuation in the experience of nature, where there is no seer, only seeing: "I am nothing; I see all." This immersion in nature compensates us in our most difficult adversity and provides a sanctification of experience profoundly religious —the direct religious experience that Emerson was to call for all his life. While Emerson characterizes traversing the common with mystical language, it is also importantly a matter of knowledge. The fundamental knowledge of nature that circulates through him is the basis of all human knowledge but cannot be distinguished, in Emerson's thought, from divine understanding.

The unity of nature is the unity of variety, and "each particle is a microcosm." There is, Emerson writes “a universal soul” that, influenced by Coleridge, he named "reason." Nature is by turns exhortative and pessimistic, like the work of the English Romantics, portraying man as a creature fallen away from a primordial connection with nature. Man ought to live in a original relation to the universe, an assault on convention he repeats in various formulas throughout his life; however, "man is the dwarf of himself . . . is disunited with himself . . . is a god in ruins." Nature concludes with a version of Emerson's permanent program, the admonition to conform your life to the "pure idea in your mind," a prescription for living he never abandons.

"The American Scholar" and “The Divinity School Address” are generally held to be representative statements of Emerson's early period. "The American Scholar," delivered as the Phi Beta Kappa oration at Harvard in 1837, repeats a call for a distinctively American scholarly life and a break with European influences and models—a not original appeal in the 1830s. Emerson begins with a familiar critique of American and particularly New England culture by asserting that Americans were "a people too busy to give to letters any more." What must have surprised the audience was his anti-scholarly theme, that "Books are for the scholar's idle times," an idea that aligns the prodigiously learned and widely read Emerson with the critique of excessive bookishness found in Wordsworth and English Romanticism. Continuing in this theme, Emerson argues against book knowledge entirely and in favor of lived experience: "Only so much do I know, as I have lived." Nature is the most important influence on the mind, he told his listeners, and it is the same mind, one mind, that writes and reads. Emerson calls for both creative writing and "creative reading," individual development being essential for the encounter with mind found in books. The object of scholarly culture is not the bookworm but "Man Thinking," Emerson's figure for an active, self-reliant intellectual life that thus puts mind in touch with Mind and the "Divine Soul." Through this approach to the study of letters, Emerson predicts that in America "A nation of men will for the first time exist."

"The Divinity School Address," also delivered at Harvard in 1838, was considerably more controversial and marked in earnest the beginning of Emerson's opposition to the climate of organized religion in his day, even the relatively liberal theology of Cambridge and the Unitarian Church. Emerson set out defiantly to insist on the divinity of all men rather than one single historical personage, a position at odds with Christian orthodoxy but one central to his entire system of thought. The original relation to nature Emerson insisted upon ensures an original relation to the divine, not copied from the religious experience of others, even Jesus of Nazareth. Emerson observes that in the universe there is a "justice" operative in the form of compensation: “He who does a good deed is instantly ennobled." This theme he would develop powerfully into a full essay, "Compensation” (1841). Whether Emerson characterized it as compensation, retribution, balance, or unity, the principle of an automatic response to all human action, good or ill, was a permanent fixture of his thought. "Good is positive," he argued to the vexation of many in the audience, “evil merely privative, not absolute." Emerson concludes his address with a subversive call to rely on one's self, to "go alone; to refuse the good models.”

Two of Emerson's first non-occasional public lectures from this early period contain especially important expressions of his thought. Always suspicious of reform and reformers, Emerson was yet an advocate of reform causes. In "Man the Reformer" (1841), Emerson expresses this ambivalence by speculating that if we were to "Let our affection flow out to our fellows; it would operate in a day the greatest of all revolutions." In an early and partial formulation of his theory that all people, times, and places are essentially alike, he writes in "Lecture on the Times" (1841) that “The Times . . . have their root in an invisible spiritual reality;" then more fully in "The Transcendentalist” (1842): “new views . . . are not new, but the very oldest of thoughts cast into the mould of these new times." Such ideas, while quintessential Emerson, are nevertheless positions that he would qualify and complicate over the next twenty years.

Emerson brought out his Essays: First Series, in 1841, which contain perhaps his single most influential work, "Self-Reliance." Emerson's style as an essayist, not unlike the form of his public lectures, operates best at the level of the individual sentence. His essays are bound together neither by their stated theme nor the progression of argument, but instead by the systematic coherence of his thought alone. Indeed, the various titles of Emerson's do not limit the subject matter of the essays but repeatedly bear out the abiding concerns of his philosophy. Another feature of his rhetorical style involves exploring the contrary poles of a particular idea, similar to a poetic antithesis. As a philosopher-poet, Emerson employs a highly figurative style, while his poetry is remarkable as a poetry of ideas. The language of the essays is sufficiently poetical that Thoreau felt compelled to say critically of the essays—"they were not written exactly at the right crisis [to be poetry] though inconceivably near it." In “History” Emerson attempts to demonstrate the unity of experience of men of all ages: "What Plato has thought, he may think; what a saint has felt, he may feel; what at any time has befallen any man, he may understand." Interestingly, for an idealist philosopher, he describes man as "a bundle of relations." The experience of the individual self is of such importance in Emerson's conception of history that it comes to stand for history: "there is properly no history; only biography." Working back from this thought, Emerson connects his understanding of this essential unity to his fundamental premise about the relation of man and nature: "the mind is one, and that nature is correlative." By correlative, Emerson means that mind and nature are themselves representative, symbolic, and consequently correlate to spiritual facts. In the wide-ranging style of his essays, he returns to the subject of nature, suggesting that nature is itself a repetition of a very few laws, and thus implying that history repeats itself consistently with a few recognizable situations. Like the Danish philosopher Soren Kierkegaard, Emerson disavowed nineteenth century notions of progress, arguing in the next essay of the book, "Society never advances . . . For everything that is given, something is taken."

"Self-Reliance" is justly famous as a statement of Emerson's credo, found in the title and perhaps uniquely among his essays, consistently and without serious digression throughout the work. The emphasis on the unity of experience is the same: "what is true for you in your private heart is true for all men." Emerson rests his abiding faith in the individual—"Trust thyself”—on the fundamental link between each man and the divine reality, or nature, that works through him. Emerson wove this explicit theme of self-trust throughout his work, writing in "Heroism" (1841), “Self-trust is the essence of heroism.” The apostle of self-reliance perceived that the impulses that move us may not be benign, that advocacy of self-trust carried certain social risks. No less a friend of Emerson's than Herman Melville parodied excessive faith in the individual through the portrait of Captain Ahab in his classic American novel, Moby-Dick. Nevertheless, Emerson argued that if our promptings are bad they come from our inmost being. If we are made thus we have little choice in any case but to be what we are. Translating this precept into the social realm, Emerson famously declares, "Whoso would be a man must be a nonconformist"—a point of view developed at length in both the life and work of Thoreau. Equally memorable and influential on Walt Whitman is Emerson's idea that "a foolish consistency is the hobgoblin of small minds, adored by little statesmen and philosophers and divines." In Leaves of Grass, Whitman made of his contradictions a virtue by claiming for himself a vastness of character that encompassed the vastness of the American experience. Emerson opposes on principle the reliance on social structures (civil, religious) precisely because through them the individual approaches the divine second hand, mediated by the once original experience of a genius from another age: "An institution," as he explains, “is the lengthened shadow of one man." To achieve this original relation one must "Insist on one's self; never imitate” for if the relationship is secondary the connection is lost. "Nothing," Emerson concludes, “can bring you peace but the triumph of principles,” a statement that both in tone and content illustrates the vocational drive of the former minister to speak directly to a wide audience and preach a practical philosophy of living.

Three years later in 1844 Emerson published his Essays: Second Series, eight essays and one public lecture, the titles indicating the range of his interests: "The Poet," “Experience,” “Character,” “Manners,” “Gifts,” “Nature,” “Politics,” “Nominalist and Realist," and "New England Reformers.” “The Poet” contains the most comprehensive statement on Emerson's aesthetics and art. This philosophy of art has its premise in the Transcendental notion that the power of nature operates through all being, that it is being: "For we are not pans and barrows . . . but children of the fire, made of it, and only the same divinity transmuted." Art and the products of art of every kind—poetry, sculpture, painting, and architecture—flow from the same unity at the root of all human experience. Emerson's aesthetics stress not the object of art but the force that creates the art object, or as he characterizes this process in relation to poetry: "it is not metres, but a metre-making argument that makes a poem." “The Poet” repeats anew the Emersonian dictum that nature is itself a symbol, and thus nature admits of being used symbolically in art. While Emerson does not accept in principle social progress as such, his philosophy emphasizes the progress of spirit, particularly when understood as development. This process he allies with the process of art: "Nature has a higher end . . . ascension, or the passage of the soul into higher forms." The realm of art, ultimately for Emerson, is only an intermediary function, not an end itself: "Art is the path of the creator to his work." On this and every subject, Emerson reveals the humanism at the core of his philosophy, his human centric perspective that posits the creative principle above the created thing. "There is a higher work for Art than the arts," he argues in the essay "Art," and that work is the full creative expression of human being. Nature too has this “humanism,” to speak figuratively, in its creative process, as he writes in "The Method of Nature:" “The universe does not attract us until housed in an individual.” Most notable in "The Poet" is Emerson's call for an expressly American poetry and poet to do justice to the fact that “America is a poem in our eyes." What is required is a "genius . . . with tyrannous eye, which knew the value of our incomparable materials” and can make use of the "barbarism and materialism of the times." Emerson would not meet Whitman for another decade, only after Whitman had sent him anonymously a copy of the first edition of Leaves of Grass, in which—indicative of Emerson's influence—Whitman self-consciously assumes the role of the required poet of America and asserts, like his unacknowledged mentor, that America herself is indeed a poem.

"Experience" remains one of Emerson's best-known and often-anthologized essays. It is also an essay written out of the devastating grief that struck the Emerson household after the death of their five-year-old son, Waldo. He wrote, whether out of conviction or helplessness, "I grieve that grief can teach me nothing." Emerson goes on, rocking back and forth between resignation and affirmation, establishing along the way a number of key points. In "Experience" he defines “spirit” as “matter reduced to an extreme thinness." In keeping with the gradual shift in his philosophy from an emphasis on the explanatory model of "unity” to images suggesting balance, he describes "human life" as consisting of “two elements, power and form, and the proportion must be invariably kept." Among his more quotable aphorisms is "The years teach us much which the days never know,” a memorable argument for the idea that experience cannot be reduced to the smallest observable events, then added back up again to constitute a life; that there is, on the contrary, an irreducible whole present in a life and at work through us. "Experience" concludes with Emerson's hallmark optimism, a faith in human events grounded in his sense of the total penetration of the divine in all matter. "Every day," he writes, and "every act betrays the ill-concealed deity," a determined expression of his lifelong principle that the divine radiates through all being.

The early 1850s saw the publication of a number of distinctively American texts: Nathaniel Hawthorne's The Scarlet Letter (1850); Melville's Moby-Dick (1851); Harriet Beecher Stowe’s Uncle Tom’s Cabin (1852); and Whitman’s Leaves of Grass (1855). Emerson's Representative Men (1850) failed to anticipate this flowering of a uniquely American literature in at least one respect: none of his representative characters were American—nevertheless, each biography yields an insight into some aspect of Emerson's thought he finds in the man or in his work, so that Representative Men reads as the history of Emerson’s precursors in other times and places. Emerson structures the book around portraits of Plato, the Swedish mystic Emmanuel Swedenborg, the French essayist Montaigne, the poet William Shakespeare, the statesman Napoleon Bonaparte, and the writer Johann Wolfgang von Goethe. Each man stands in for a type, for example, Montaigne represents the "skeptic," Napoleon the “man of the world.” Humanity, for Emerson, consisted of recognizable but overlapping personality types, types discoverable in every age and nation, but all sharing in a common humanity that has its source in divine being. Each portrait balances the particular feature of the representative man that illustrates the general laws inhabiting humanity along with an assessment of the great man's shortcomings. Like Nietzsche, Emerson did not believe that great men were ends in themselves but served particular functions, notably for Emerson their capacity to "clear our eyes of egotism, and enable us to see other people in their works." Emerson's representative men are "great,” but “exist that there may be greater men." As a gesture toward self-criticism about an entire book on great men by the champion of American individualism, Emerson concedes, "there are no common men," and his biographical sketches ultimately balance both the limitations of each man with his—to use an oxymoron—distinctive universality, or in other words, the impact he has had on Emerson's thought. While Plato receives credit for establishing the "cardinal facts . . . the one and the two.—1. Unity, or Identity; and, 2. Variety," Emerson concedes that through Plato we have had no success in "explaining existence." It was Swedenborg, according to Emerson, who discovered that the smallest particles in nature are merely replicated and repeated in larger organizations, and that the physical world is symbolic of the spiritual. But although he approves of the religion Swedenborg urged, a spirituality of each and every moment, Emerson complains the mystic lacks the "liberality of universal wisdom." Instead, we are “always in a church.” From Montaigne, Emerson gained a heightened sense of the universal mind as he read the French philosophers' Essays, for "It seemed to me as if I had myself written the book"—as well as an enduring imperative of style: "Cut these words, and they would bleed.” The “skeptic” Montaigne, however, lacks belief, which "consists in accepting the affirmations of the soul." From Shakespeare, Emerson received confirmation that originality was a reassembly of existing ideas. The English poet possessed the rare capacity of greatness in that he allowed the spirit of his age to achieve representation through him. Nevertheless the world waits on "a poet-priest" who can see, speak, and act, with equal inspiration." Reflection on Napoleon's life teaches the value of concentration, one of Emerson’s chief virtues. In The Conduct of Life, Emerson describes "concentration," or bringing to bear all of one's powers on a single object, as the "chief prudence." Likewise, Napoleon's shrewdness consisted in allowing events to take their natural course and become representative of the forces of his time. The defect of the "man of the world" was that he possessed “the powers of intellect without conscience" and was doomed to fail. Emerson's moral summary of Napoleon’s sounds a great deal like Whitman: "Only that good profits, which we can taste with all doors open, and which serves all men." Goethe, "the writer,” like Napoleon, represents the countervailing force of nature against Emerson's lifelong opponent, what he called "the morgue of convention." Goethe is also exemplary of the man of culture whose sphere of knowledge, as Emerson himself tried to emulate with his wide and systematic reading, knows no limits or categorical boundaries. Yet, "the lawgiver of art is not an artist," and repeating a call for an original relation to the infinite, foregoing even the venerable authority of Goethe, Emerson concludes, "We too must write Bibles."

English Traits was published in 1856 but represented almost a decade of reflections on an invited lecture tour Emerson made in 1847-48 to Great Britain. English Traits presents an unusually conservative set of perspectives on a rather limited subject, that of a single nation and "race," in place of human civilization and humanity as a whole. English Traits contains an advanced understanding of race, namely, that the differences among the members of a race are greater than the differences between races, but in general introduces few new ideas. The work is highly "occasional," shaped by his travels and visits, and bore evidence of what seemed to be an erosion of energy and originality in his thought.

The Conduct of Life (1860), however, proved to be a work of startling vigor and insight and is Emerson's last important work published in his lifetime. "Fate" is arguably the central essay in the book. The subject of fate, which Emerson defines as “An expense of means to end," along with the relation of fate to freedom and the primacy of man's vocation, come to be the chief subjects of the final years of his career. Some of Emerson's finest poetry can be found in his essays. In "Fate" he writes: “A man’s power is hooped in by a necessity, which, by many experiments, he touches on every side, until he learns its arc." Fate is balanced in the essay by intellect: "So far as a man thinks, he is free." Emerson's advice for the conduct of life is to learn to swim with the tide, to "trim your bark" (that is, sails) to catch the prevailing wind. He refines and redefines his conception of history as the interaction between "Nature and thought." Emerson further refines his conception of the great man by describing him as the “impressionable” man, or the man who most perfectly captures the spirit of his time in his thought and action. Varying a biblical proverb to his own thought, Emerson argues that what we seek we will find because it is our fate to seek what is our own. Always a moderating voice in politics, Emerson writes in "Power" that the “evils of popular government appear greater than they are”—at best a lukewarm recommendation of democracy. On the subject of politics, Emerson consistently posited a faith in balance, the tendencies toward chaos and order, change and conservation always correcting each other. His late aesthetics reinforce this political stance as he veers in "Beauty" onto the subject of women's suffrage: “Thus the circumstances may be easily imagined, in which woman may speak, vote, argue causes, legislate, and drive a coach, and all the most naturally in the world, if only it come by degrees."

In his early work, Emerson emphasized the operation of nature through the individual man. The Conduct of Life uncovers the same consideration only now understood in terms of work or vocation. Emerson argued with increasing regularity throughout his career that each man is made for some work, and to ally himself with that is to render himself immune from harm: "the conviction that his work is dear to God and cannot be spared, defends him." One step above simple concentration of force in Emerson's scale of values we find his sense of dedication: "Nothing is beneath you, if it is in the direction of your life." While in favor of many of the social and political reform movements of his time, Emerson never ventured far into a critique of laissez-faire economics. In "Wealth" we find the balanced perspective, one might say contradiction, to be found in all the late work. Emerson argues that to be a "whole man" one must be able to find a "blameless living," and yet this same essay acknowledges an unsentimental definition of wealth: “He is the richest man who knows how to draw a benefit from the labors of the greatest numbers of men." In the final essay of the book, "Illusions," Emerson uses a metaphor—“the sun borrows his beams”—to reassert his pervasive humanism, the idea that we endow nature with its beauty, and that man is at the center of creation. Man is at the center, and the center will hold: "There is no chance, and no anarchy, in the universe."

3. Legacy

Emerson remains the major American philosopher of the nineteenth century and in some respects the central figure of American thought since the colonial period. Perhaps due to his highly quotable style, Emerson wields a celebrity unknown to subsequent American philosophers. The general reading public knows Emerson's work primarily through his aphorisms, which appear throughout popular culture on calendars and poster, on boxes of tea and breath mints, and of course through his individual essays. Generations of readers continue to encounter the more famous essays under the rubric of "literature" as well as philosophy, and indeed the essays, less so his poetry, stand undiminished as major works in the American literary tradition. Emerson's emphasis on self-reliance and nonconformity, his championing of an authentic American literature, his insistence on each individual's original relation to God, and finally his relentless optimism, that "life is a boundless privilege," remain his chief legacies.

4. References and Further Reading

  • Baker, Carlos. Emerson Among the Eccentrics: A Group Portrait. New York: Penguin, 1997.
  • Emerson, Ralph Waldo: Essays and Lectures. Ed. Joel Porte. New York: Library of America, 1983.
  • Essays and Poems. Ed. Joel Porte et al. New York: Library of American, 1996.
  • The Complete Sermons of Ralph Waldo Emerson. Vol. 4. Ed Wesley T. Mott et al. Columbia, MO: University of Missouri Press, 1992.
  • The Selected Letters of Ralph Waldo Emerson. Ed. Joel Myerson. New York: Columbia, 1997.
  • The Heart of Emerson's Journals. Ed. Bliss Perry. Minneola, NY: Dover Press, 1995.
  • Field, Peter. S. Ralph Waldo Emerson: The Making of a Democratic Intellectual. Lanham, MD: Rowman and Littlefield, 2002.
  • Porte, Joel. Representative Man: Ralph Waldo Emerson in His Time. New York: Columbia University Press, 1988.
  • Porte, Joel and Morris, Saundra. The Cambridge Companion to Ralph Waldo Emerson. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1999.
  • Richardson, Robert D. Jr. Emerson: The Mind on Fire. Berkeley: University of California Press, 1995

Author Information

Vince Brewton
University of North Alabama
U. S. A.

Empedocles (c. 492—432 B.C.E.)

empedoclesEmpedocles (of Acagras in Sicily) was a philosopher and poet: one of the most important of the philosophers working before Socrates (the Presocratics), and a poet of outstanding ability and of great influence upon later poets such as Lucretius. His works On Nature and Purifications (whether they are two poems or only one – see below) exist in more than 150 fragments. He has been regarded variously as a materialist physicist, a shamanic magician, a mystical theologian, a healer, a democratic politician, a living god, and a fraud. To him is attributed the invention of the four-element theory of matter (earth, air, fire, and water), one of the earliest theories of particle physics, put forward seemingly to rescue the phenomenal world from the static monism of Parmenides. Empedocles’ world-view is of a cosmic cycle of eternal change, growth and decay, in which two personified cosmic forces, Love and Strife, engage in an eternal battle for supremacy. In psychology and ethics Empedocles was a follower of Pythagoras, hence a believer in the transmigration of souls, and hence also a vegetarian. He claims to be a daimôn, a divine or potentially divine being, who, having been banished from the immortals gods for ‘three times countless years’ for committing the sin of meat-eating and forced to suffer successive reincarnations in an purificatory journey through the different orders of nature and elements of the cosmos, has now achieved the most perfect of human states and will be reborn as an immortal. He also claims seemingly magical powers including the ability to revive the dead and to control the winds and rains.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Works
  3. Physics and Cosmology
    1. Physics
    2. Cosmology
  4. Biology
    1. Origin of Species
    2. Embryology
    3. Perception and Thought
  5. Ethics and the Journey of the Soul
    1. The Daimôns and Transmigration of Souls
    2. Meat-eating and Sin
    3. Theology
    4. Physics and Theology
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Texts and Commentaries
    2. Studies

1. Life

The most detailed source for Empedocles' life is Diogenes Laertius, Lives of the Eminent Philosophers 8.51-75. Perhaps because of his claims to divine status and magical powers a remarkable number of apocryphal stories gathered around the life of Empedocles in antiquity. His death in particular attracted attention and is reported to have occurred in several, clearly bathetic, ways: that he fell overboard from a ship and drowned; that he fell from his carriage, broke his leg and died; that he hanged himself; or the most famous account that, when he felt he was shortly to die and because he wished to appear to have been apotheosized, he leapt into the crater of Etna. In this story the ruse was unfortunately discovered when one of his trademark bronze sandals was thrown up by the volcano.

From more reliable sources it seems that he was born at Acragas in Sicily around 492 B.C.E. and died at the age of sixty. He was the son of a certain Meton, and was from an important and wealthy local aristocratic family: his grandfather, also called Empedocles, is reported to have been victorious in horse-racing at the Olympic Games in 496 B.C.E. It is not known where or with whom he studied philosophy, but various teachers are assigned to him by ancient sources, among them Parmenides, Pythagoras, Xenophanes, Anaxagoras and Anaximander (from whom he is said to have inherited his extravagant mode of dress). Whether or not he was his pupil, Empedocles was certainly very familiar with the work of Parmenides from whom he took the inspiration to write in hexameter verse, and whose physical system he adopts in part, and partly seeks to rectify.

He is reported to have been wealthy and to have kept a train of boy attendants and also to have provided dowries for many girls of Acragas. In dress he affected a purple robe with a golden girdle, bronze sandals, and a Delphic laurel-wreath, and in his manner he was grave and cultivated a regal public persona. These attributes contrast with his political outlook which is uniformly reported to have been actively pro-democratic. He began his political career with the prosecution of two state officials for their arrogant behaviour towards foreign guests which was seen as a sign of incipient tyrannical tendencies. He is also credited with activities against other anti-democratic citizens, and even with putting down an oligarchy and instituting a democracy at Acragas by use of his powers of rhetorical persuasion. Two speeches of his in favour of equality are also mentioned. His surviving poetry certainly shows considerable rhetorical skills, and indeed he is credited by Aristotle with the invention of rhetoric itself. Another report is of his breaking up a shadowy aristocratic political organisation called the 'Thousand'. As a whole the tradition presents a picture of Empedocles as a popular politician, rhetorician, and champion of democracy and equality. This appears to fit in with the known history of Acragas where after the death of the popular and enlightened tyrant Theron in 473 B.C.E. his son Thrasydaeus proved to be a violent despot. After his forcible removal a democracy was established despite continuing political tensions.

As well as a being a philosopher, poet and politician, Empedocles was famous for his medical skills and healing powers. In his works he presents himself as a wandering healer offering to thousands of eager followers 'prophecies' and ‘words of healing for all kinds of illnesses' (fr. 112 (Fragment numbers are those of Diels-Kranz)). He also promises his addressee Pausanias 'you will learn remedies (pharmaka) for ills and help against old age' and even ‘you will lead from Hades the life-force of a dead man'. To what degree this represents the real Empedocles is not known, but a tradition grew up of him as both a renowned physician and a practitioner of more magical cures, or as a charlatan. These stories however, may well derive from Empedocles' own words in his poetry. On the other hand his work does show considerable interest in biology and especially in embryology and he was eminent enough as a writer on medicine to be attack ed by the writer of the Hippocratic treatise On Ancient Medicine who attempts to separate medicine from philosophy and rejects Empedocles' work along with all philosophical medical works as irrelevant. The stories of his wonder-working such as curing entire plagues, reviving the dead and controlling the elements are clearly exaggerated at least, but it is becoming clearer, especially since the discovery of the Strasbourg fragments (see below), that, contrary to many former interpretations, Empedocles did not make a clear separation between his philosophy of nature and the more mystical, theological aspects of his philosophy, and so may well have seen no great difference in kind between healing ills through empirical understanding of human physiognomy and healing by means of sacred incantations and ritual purifications. His public as well may have made no great distinction between 'scientific' and sacred medicine as is suggested by the account of Empedocles curing a plague by restoring a fresh water-supply, after which he was venerated as a god.

2. Works

Empedocles work survives only in fragments, but luckily in a far greater number than any of the other Presocratics. These fragments are mostly quotations found in other authors such as Aristotle and Plutarch. Although many works, including tragedies and a medical treatise, are attributed to Empedocles by ancient sources no fragments of these have survived, and the extant fragments all come from a work of hexameter poetry traditionally entitled On Nature (Peri Phuseôs) or Physics (Phusika) and some from a possibly separate work called Purifications (Katharmoi). Of these two titles On Nature is by far the better attested and nearly all the fragments which are cited by ancient authors along with the title of the work they came from are attributed to On Nature, while only two are attributed to the Purifications. Because the fragments contain both material that clearly refers to physics and cosmology - the four elements, the cosmic cycle etc. – and also material concerning the fate of the soul, sin and purification, traditionally the former were placed in reconstructions of On Nature, and the latter in the Purifications. Indeed Empedocles' writings contain ideas and themes that may seem quite incompatible with one another. On Natureas usually reconstructed seemed the work of a mechanist physicist which seeks to replace the traditional gods with four lifeless impersonal elements and two cosmic forces of attraction and repulsion, Love and Strife. The Purifications on the other hand seemed the work of a deeply religious Pythagorean mystic: it was often thought that Empedocles either wrote the Purifications as a move away from the mechanistic materialist position in On Nature, or that the Purifications were an addendum to On Nature, looking at the world from quite a different perspective.

However there have long been doubts about whether there were really two poems or only one poem (perhaps called On Nature and Purifications or with On Nature and Purifications as alternative titles for the same work) which contained both physical and religious material. First, although we may think of a poem called Physics as restricting itself to physical concerns alone, this may well be an anachronistic retrojection of modern rationalistic ideas of a gulf between physics and religion. Further, ancient book titles tend to be generic and there is a long tradition of works called either On Nature (Peri Phuseôs) or Physics (Physika) by various authors, with the earliest attested title for such works being On the Nature of the Universe (Peri Phuseôs tôn Ontôn 'On the Nature of Things that Exist'), and so neither title may be Empedocles' own and the two may perhaps be interchangeable different titles for the same work. Although there is still argument on this subject the Strasbourg fragments now suggest strongly that both physical and religious material was originally together in On Nature.

In 1990 the first ancient papyrus fragments of Empedocles were rediscovered at the University of Strasbourg and were published in 1999. Since these were also the first papyrus fragments of any of the Presocratics their discovery caused considerable excitement. Among other important new information they give about Empedocles' philosophy, with great good fortune fr. a, the longest of the new fragments, was found to be a continuation of the longest of the previously known fragments (fr. 17) and thus now the two together form a continuous text of 69 lines. Fr. 17 is cited by Simplicius as being from book one of On Nature, and again very fortunately Strasbourg fr. a(ii) contains a marginal note by the manuscript copyist identifying line 30 of fr. a(ii) as line 300 of book one of On Nature. Since the Strasbourg fragments seem to have come from a single piece of papyrus, and they also overlap with a formerly known religious fragment usually placed in the Purifications (fr. 1 39) it now seems very likely that Empedocles introduced the themes of sin and purification early on in the physical poem. In fact it can now be argued that all of the fragments of the Purifications can be accommodated in the early part of book one of On Nature.

3. Physics and Cosmology

a. Physics

The foundations of Empedocles' physics lie in the assumption that there are four 'elements’ of matter, or ‘roots’ as he calls them, using a botanical metaphor that stresses their creative potential: earth, air, fire and water. These are able to create all things, including all living creatures, by being 'mixed' in different combinations and proportions. Each of the elements however, retains its own characteristics in the mixture, and each is eternal and unchanging. The positing of these four roots of matter forms part of a tradition of opposite material creative principles in Presocratic philosophy, but it also has its origins in an attempt to counter the theories of Parmenides who had argued that the world is single and unchanging since nothing can come from nothing and nothing can be destroyed into nothing: the theory known as Eleatic monism. Empedocles' response was to appropriate Parmenides’ ideas and to use them against themselves. Nothing can come from nothing nor be destroyed into nothing (fr. 12), and therefore, in order to rescue the reality of the phenomenal world, there must be assumed to exist something eternal and unchanging beneath the constant change, growth and decay of the visible world. Empedocles then, transfers the changelessness that Parmenides attributes to the entire world to his four elements, and replaces the static singularity Parmenides' world with a dynamic plurality. The four elements correspond closely to their expression at the macroscopic level of nature, with the traditional quadripartite division of the cosmos into earth, sea, air, and the fiery aether of the heavenly bodies: these four naturally occurring 'elements' of the cosmos clearly represent a fundamental natural division of matter at the largest scale. This division at the macroscopic level of reality is applied reductively at the microscopic level to produce a parallelism between the constituents of matter and the fundamental constituents of the cosmos, but the reduction of the world into four types of material particles does not deny the reality of the world we see, but instead validates it. Empedocles stresses this parallel between the elements at the different levels of reality by using the terms 'sun' ‘sea’ and ‘Earth’ interchangeably with ‘fire’, ‘water’ and ‘earth’. Of the four elements, although Empedocles stresses their equality of powers, fire is also granted a special role both in its hardening effect on mixtures of the other elements and also as the fundamental principle of living things.

b. Cosmology

Empedocles also posits two cosmic forces which work upon the elements in both creative and destructive ways. These he personifies as Love (Philia) - a force of attraction and combination – and Strife (Neikos) – a force of repulsion and separation. Whether these cosmic forces are to be envisaged in simply mechanistic terms as descriptions of the way things happen, or as expressions of internal properties of the elements, or as external forces that act upon the elements, is not clear. It is also unclear whether the two forces are to be seen as impersonal mechanistic physical forces or as intelligent divinities that act in purposive ways in creation and destruction. Evidence can be found for all these interpretations. What is clear is that these two forces are engaged in an eternal battle for domination of the cosmos and that they each prevail in turn in an endless cosmic cycle. The details of this cosmic cycle are also difficult to establish, but the most widely accepted interpretation is represented in the following diagram:


Beginning from the top of the diagram and proceeding clockwise, when Love is completely dominant she draws all the elements fully together into a Sphere in which, although the elements are not fused together into a single mass, each is indistinguishable from the others. The Sphere then, is an a-cosmic state during which no matter can exist, and no life is possible. Then as Love's power gradually weakens and Strife begins to grow in power, he gradually separates out the elements from the Sphere until there is enough separation for matter to come into existence, for the world to be created and for all life to be born. When Strife has achieved total domination we again get an a-cosmic state in which the elements are separated completely and the world and all life is destroyed in a Whirl. Then Love begins to increase in power and to draw the elements together again, and as she does so the world is again created and life is again born. When Love has achieved full dominan ce we return once more to the sphere. As Empedocles puts it in fr. 17.1-8:

A twofold tale I shall tell: at one time it grew to be one only from many, and at another again it divided to be many from one. There is a double birth of what is mortal, and a double passing away; for the uniting of all things brings one generation into being and destroys it, and the other is reared and scattered as they are again being divided. And these things never cease their continuous exchange of position, at one time all coming together into one through Love, at another again being borne away from each other by Strife's repulsion.

The cosmos exists in a state of constant flux then, beneath which there is a certain sort of stability in the eternity of the elements. The world is in a constant state of organic evolution, and there appear to be two different creations and two different worlds which have no direct link between them. According the most widely accepted interpretation Empedocles considered that we ourselves inhabit the world under the increasing power of Strife.

4. Biology

Empedocles' physics have a particularly biological focus as is indicated by his choice of the botanical metaphor of 'roots’ for what were later called 'elements'. The term ‘roots’ stresses the creative potential of the roots rather than illustrating the way they create things by being mixed in different combinations: 'elements' (stoicheia in Greek, elementa in Latin) is the word for the letters of the alphabet, and is a metaphor that stresses the ability of the elements of matter to form different types of matter by interchange of position just as a limited number of letters are able to form all sorts of different words on the page. To illustrate this aspect of the creative abilities of his roots Empedocles uses an analogy with the way painters can use a limited number of colours to create all sorts of different colours and represent all the different productions of nature.
Fr. 23:

As painters, men well taught by wisdom in the practice of their art, decorate temple offerings when they take in their hands pigments of various colours, and after fitting them in close combination - more of some and less of others – they produce from them shapes resembling all things, creating trees and men and women, animals and birds and water-nourished fish, and long-lived gods too, highest in honor; so let not error convince you in your mind that there is any other source for the countless perishables that are seen, but know this clearly, since the account you have heard is divinely revealed.

Among other aspects, this analogy exhibits Empedocles' tendency to think about the creative abilities of the elements in terms of their biological products, here a characteristically Empedoclean list of creatures representing the different orders of nature: plants, humans, land animals, birds, and fish, as well as gods. If painters use a mixture of a small number of pigments to produce copies of the works of nature, then the same process is productive of those works of nature. In other ways as well in his presentation of the cosmic cycle and the endless combination and separation of the elements he tends to elide the distinction between the elements and the life-forms they produce. Just as in the parallel he draws between the elements of the cosmos on both microscopic and macroscopic levels, so a close parallel is drawn between living creatures and their constituent elements.

a. Origin of Species

Empedocles presents us with the earliest extant attempt at producing a detailed rational mechanism for the origin of species. Greek traditions include the aetiological myths of the origin of a particular species of animal by transformation from a human being (many of these ancient mythological aetiologies are collected by Ovid in the Metamorphoses). The origins of humans, or of particular heroes, founders of cities or of races is frequently explained by what I term a botanical analogy: they originally emerged autochthonously from the ground just as plants do today, and this is also standard in ancient scientific theories as well: the original spontaneous generation of life from the earth, with all creatures emerging in their present species. Empedocles attempts to provide a comprehensive mechanism for the origins not simply of humans or of a particular animal but of all animal life, including humans, and a rational mechanism that would seem to do away with the need for any design in creatures or any external agency to order them and separate them into their individual species.

In Strasbourg fr. a(ii) 23-30 we now find the following lines in which Empedocles seemingly introduces his account of zoogony:

I will show you to your eyes too, where they find a larger body: first the coming together and the unfolding of birth, and as many as are now remaining of this generation. This [is to be seen] among the wilder species of mountain-roaming beasts; this [is to be seen] in the twofold offspring of men, this [is to be seen] in the produce of the root-bearing fields and of the cluster of grapes mounting on the vine. From these convey to your mind unerring proofs of my account: for you will see the coming together and unfolding of birth.

Empedocles promises an exposition of zoogony and the origin of species which, from the examples he gives - wild animals, humans and plants - is clearly intended to encompass all animal and plant life, including humans. He appeals to present day species as proofs of his theories: we can see both the products of this process of zoogony around us in nature today and also, it seems, we can see the same processes still going on today. That the theory refers to present day species rather than creatures in some counter world is underlined by the stress Empedocles puts on 'as many as are now remaining of this generation'. So the theory is intended to explain the origin and development of all life and refers specifically to the animals and plants around us today, both as examples of and as proofs of the theory he will propose. This process of generation he describes by the repeated 'the coming together and the unfolding of birth'. This seems to posit two processes which work, either together or separately, to produce the life we see around us today: a process of coming together and also a process of unfolding or perhaps more strictly 'unleafing' since the metaphor originates from the leaves of plants. So the second part of this process of zoogony involves a botanical metaphor: just as in the traditional botanical analogy of the myths of autochthony, an appeal to the development and growth of plants is used to describe the process of the development of all life.

According to fragments B57, B59, B60, and B61, first of all individual limbs and organs were produced from the earth. These wandered separately at first and then under the combining power of Love they came together in all sorts of wild and seemingly random hybrid combinations, producing double fronted creatures, hermaphrodites, ox-faced man creatures and man-faced ox-creatures. This weird picture is explained by Aristotle in the Physics and later in more detail by Simplicius in his commentary on the Physics as a theory of the origin of species in which, as we would put it, a certain form of natural selection is operative. The creatures assembled wrongly from parts of disparate animals will die out, either immediately, or by being unable to breed, and only the creatures by chance put together from homogeneous limbs will survive and so go on to found the species that we see today. The production of species and their ordering then is explained by a mechanistic process long recognised as a forerunner of Darwin's theory of natural selection. Unlike in Darwin's theory however, there would seem to be no gradual evolution of one species into another, and all of the variety of nature is produced in a great burst of birth in the beginning and is then whittled down by extinctions into the creatures we see today. That this theory intends to account for the origins of both humans and animals is ensured by the component parts of the ox-headed man-creatures and man-headed ox-creatures. There will clearly also be created by this system man-headed man-creatures and ox-headed ox-creatures, that is to say normal oxen and normal humans, although they are not mentioned. Further evidence that this zoogony relates to present day creatures is given by Aristotle and Simplicius who tell us that this process is still going on today.

However, Empedocles also adds to this theory another explanation of the origins of humans very much along the lines of traditional myths of autochthony. In fr. B62 and Strasbourg fr. d he describes the 'shoots' of men and women arising from the earth, drawn up by fire as it separates out from the other elements during the creation under the power of increasing Strife. As his choice of the word 'shoots' indicates these are not yet fully articulated people with distinct limbs but ‘whole-nature forms’ that ‘did not as yet show the lovely shape of limbs, or voice or language native to man'. We may assume that as Strife increases in power these 'shoots’ will, just as plant buds do, gradually become fully articulated with distinct limbs and features. So human origins are accounted for by a botanical analogy, with humans as biological productions of the earth itself. This theory is also intended to account for modern-day as humans, as Strasbourg fr. d tells us 'even now daylight beholds their remains'. So both the creation under Love and the creation under Strife refer to the origins of modern plants, animals, and humans. This is problematic since according to the picture of the cosmic cycle given above the world created by Strife is quite separate from that created by Love, and two quite different explanations are given by Empedocles for each creation of life. Various attempts have been made to account for this, including a radical revision of the cosmic cycle in order to allow both creations of life to take place within the same world, and also seeing the two different worlds of the cosmic cycle as more useful devices for examining different aspects of creation separately than absolutely chronologically separate phases of a cycle: the work of Love in combining creatures and the work of Strife in articulating them would then actually take place at the same time, but are simply described as operative in chronologically separate phases.

b. Embryology

Empedocles is an exponent of the pangenetic theory of embryology. In this theory inheritance of characteristics from both mother and father is explained by each of the two parents' limbs and organs creating tiny copies of themselves. These miniature limbs and organs then flow together in the generative seed and when the two seeds combine in the womb the father's seed may provide the model for the nose, while the mother's seed the model for the eyes and so on. This is an elegant way of accounting for inheritance of characteristics, but this is unlikely to be the whole story. As Aristotle points out there are strong conceptual similarities between Empedocles' embryology and the creation under Love in which we see the coming together of pre-formed limbs creating life. So Empedocles thinks of the original formation of animals as a process analogous to the present day formation of the embryo in the womb. From his description in Strasbourg fr. a (ii) 23-30 'the coming together and unfolding of birth' we seem to have two processes that are at work in the formation of both present day creatures and the original creation of life. The 'coming together' describes both the original coming together of the limbs of the first creatures and also the coming together of the tiny limbs in conception. The other side of the creative process, the 'unfolding' is illustrated by the creation under Strife of the ‘shoots of men and pitiable women’ whose limbs are at first not fully articulated or defined: they will undergo a process of 'unfolding' just like plant buds and become fully developed humans. This 'unfolding' is clearly paralleled in embryology by the gradual development and growth of the embryo in the womb. Therefore it may be best to think of the tiny limbs and organs contained in the generative seed not as fully developed limbs and organs, but as the genetic material that contains the potential for the development of limbs and organs. This is so mewhat speculative, but would provide Empedocles with a much more nearly truly evolutionary theory of the origin of species than had previously been ascribed to him. Certainly the differentiation into the two sexes is described in terms of potential: the warmth of the womb determines whether the embryo will be male or female, cf. fr B 65: 'They were poured in pure places; some met with cold and became women', fr. B 67: 'For the male was warmer . . . this is the reason why men are dark, more powerfully built, and hairier’. It may be that other characteristics are also determined or informed by environmental factors as well.

c. Perception and Thought

Empedocles seems to have been the first philosopher to give a detailed explanation of the mechanism by which we perceive things. His theory, criticised by Aristotle and Theophrastus, is that all things give off effluences and that these enter pores in the sense organs. The pores and the effluences will be of varying shapes and sizes and so only certain effluences enter certain sense-organs if they meet pores of the correct size and shape to admit them. Further, perception is achieved by the attraction of similars: we perceive light colours with fire in the eye, dark colours with water, smell is achieved by the presence of breath in the nostrils etc.

As Theophrastus complains, perception is closely linked to thought by Empedocles, cf. fr. B109:

With earth, we perceive earth, with water water, with air divine fire, with fire destructive fire, with love love, and strife with baneful strife.

fr. B 107:

All things are fitted together and constructed out of these, and by means of them they think and feel pleasure and pain.

In B 109 Empedocles moves from perception of physical elements to ethical perceptions using the same theory of perception by similars, while in B 107 we can see the theory used to account more directly for thought itself. Hence for Empedocles there is a close link between what we perceive and what we think. Further our thoughts will also be affected by our own physical constitutions (B 108). This process of the attraction of like to like is operative from the most fundamental level with the parts of the roots of matter being attracted to their like, right up to the highest level of the purest mixture which is the highest form of thought. Hence it seems that everything in nature has a share in perception and intelligence, cf. fr. 110.10: 'know that all things have intelligence and a share of thought'.

5. Ethics and the Journey of the Soul

a. The Daimôns and Transmigration of Souls

Plutarch cites the following fragment as coming from 'the beginning of Empedocles' philosophy’, fr. B 115:

There is a decree of necessity, ratified long ago by gods, eternal and sealed by broad oaths, that whenever one in error, from fear, defiles his own limbs, having by his error made false the oath he swore - daimôns to whom life long-lasting is apportioned – he wanders from the blessed ones for three-times countless years, being born throughout the time as all kinds of mortal forms, exchanging one hard way of life for another. For the force of air pursues him into the sea, and sea spits him out onto earth's surface, earth casts him in the rays of blazing sun, and sun into the eddies of air; one takes him from another, and all abhor him. I too am now one of these, an exile from the gods and a wanderer, having put my trust in raving Strife.

Traditionally Plutarch's seeming attribution of this fragment to On Naturewas assumed to be incorrect and it was placed in the Purifications instead. However from the evidence of the Strasbourg fragments it seems that it may well be that Plutarch was correct, since they contain a description of the details of the sin Empedocles accuses himself of in fr. 115, cf. Strasbourg fr. d lines 5-6:

'Alas that merciless day did not destroy me sooner, before I devised with my claws terrible deeds for the sake of food'

In fr. 115 Empedocles describes himself as a 'daimôn', a being to whom long life has been granted, but who has committed the sin of meat-eating and bloodshed and consequently is punished by banishment from the company of the immortal gods. The banishment lasts three myriads of years, either 'three-times countless years' or thirty thousand years. In either case he must atone for his sin by being repeatedly reincarnated into all the different living forms of the different orders of nature. Elsewhere he says: 'For before now I have been at some time boy and girl, bush, bird, and a mute fish in the sea' (fr. B 117). Empedocles then, has already suffered this nearly endless cycle of reincarnations having been seemingly hurled down to the lowest rung of the scale of nature but has worked his way up, has been purified at last and, as he tells us in fr. B. 112, is himself now an immortal god. There are others too numbered among the daimôns, those who 'at the end ... come among men on earth as prophets, minstrels, physicians and leaders, and from these they arise as gods, highest in honour.' (fr. 146). It is not entirely clear whether we are meant to imagine the daimôns as an entirely separate class of blessed being with a different creation and a different fate from ourselves, the ordinary mortals, or as people who began as ordinary mortals but who, having purified themselves and having achieved perfection, are now approaching divine status. The latter reading would perhaps make more sense in terms of Empedocles' didactic ethical mission: if we are all potentially perfectable, then his purificatory teaching becomes much more crucial. Empedocles himself, as his life shows, has achieved all four of the states that qualify the daimôns for immortality, he is a prophet, a minstrel, a physician and a leader, and can now pass on his wisdom to those on earth whom he is about to leave behind when he rejoins the company of the immortals. As can be seen from the description above, there are strong similarities between Empedocles and the teachings of Pythagoras on the transmigration of souls. Empedocles is clearly a follower of Pythagoras, in his ethics and psychology at least, and shares his vegetarianism and pacifism.

b. Meat-eating and Sin

Slaughter and meat-eating are the most terrible of sins, indeed for him animal slaughter is murder and meat-eating is cannibalism, as shown by fr. 137:

The father will lift up his dear son in changed form, and blind fool, as he prays he will slay him, and those who take part in the sacrifice bring the victim as he pleads. But the father, deaf to his cries, slays him in his house and prepares an evil feast. In the same way son seizes father, and children their mother, and having bereaved them of life devour the flesh of those they love.

Here, in terms reminiscent of Hesiod's description of the coming horrors of the Iron Age in Works and Days, we see the appalling consequences of meat-eating: murder, cannibalism, the destruction of whole families and, by extrapolation, of entire societies. This is a radical position in both political and religious terms. Plato's Protagoras in the eponymous dialogue can simply assume that all men agree that warfare is 'a fine and noble thing'. For Empedocles warfare, one fundamental plank of the Greek city state, is the most appalling of all evils and is punished by the immortals by hurling the perpetrators not only out of their society, but out of human society and even down to the level of the lowest forms of nature.

c. Theology

In religious terms as well traditional animal sacrifice, another fundamental basis of Greek society, becomes the grossest impiety of all. A probably apocryphal tale reports that Empedocles sacrificed an ox made of honey and meal at Olympia, the religious heart of Greece: a pointed act of criticism of traditional religion. Further evidence for his radical theology lies in his appropriation of the names of the Olympian gods for his roots of matter and his cosmic forces. Implicitly he argues that the Olympian gods came into being as misinterpretations of the natural world: the real 'gods' are the elements of nature and the cosmic forces that direct their endless evolutionary cycle. His religious and ethical teachings then are of purification of the soul in an attempt to achieve perfection and unity with perfect Love. He pictures a time in the past, a sort of golden age, when this universal harmony existed, fr. B 128:

They did not have Ares as god or Kydoimos, nor king Zeus, nor Kronos, nor Poseidon but queen Kypris [Love]. Her they propitiated with holy images and painted animal figures, with perfumes of subtle fragrance and offerings of distilled myrrh and sweet-smelling frankincense, and pouring on the earth libations of golden honey. Their altar was not drenched by the unspeakable slaughter of bulls, but this was the greatest defilement among men - to bereave of life and eat noble limbs.

fr. B 130:

All creatures, both animals and birds, were tame and gentle to men, and bright was the flame of their friendship.

Originally people worshipped only one god, Love, and this resulted in universal harmony, even between humans and animals. Implicitly the argument runs that the worship of the Olympian gods he mentions, Ares, Zeus and Poseidon, and the sacrifices they demand have destroyed this harmony, resulting in worship also of Kydoimos, the personification of the noise of battle. Traditional religion with their sacrificial slaughter and meat-eating have had a degrading effect on society.

d. Physics and Theology

As I say above it now seems very likely that Empedocles discussed purificatory topics early on in his poem On Nature. Unlike for modern rationalists then, it seems that for Empedocles there was no fundamental divide between physics and religion. Indeed as can be seen from fr. B 115 above the sin of the daimôn results in an expiatory journey of the soul not only through the different orders of living creatures but through the physical elements of the cosmos. Empedocles draws a close analogy between the cycle of the soul and the cycle of the cosmos itself. This is a hallmark of his work: frequently he uses the same language whether describing the journey of the soul or the cycle of the elements. Sometimes in the Strasbourg fragments the description of the elements coming together under the power of Love is rendered as 'we are coming together'. His sin, in fr. 115, he describes as resulting from having put his trust in raving Strife, one of his cosmic forces, and conversely in fr. 130 we see the people of the golden age worshipping the other cosmic force, Love. Clearly there is more than a little cross-over between physics and ethics for Empedocles. How this works in detail is hard to pin down but perhaps the best reading we can give of On Natureis that it represents the detailed expression of the cycle of the soul at the level of the entire cosmos. The endless evolutionary cycling of the elements is in fact part of the cycle of the soul.

(Note: all translations are by M. R. Wright except those of the Strasbourg fragments which are by O. Primavesi and A. Martin.)

6. References and Further Reading

a. Texts and Commentaries

  • Bollack, J. Empédocle, (Paris, 1965-9), 4 vols. With Greek text, French translation, and commentary.
  • Diels, H. and W. Kranz, Die Fragmente der Vorsokratiker (Berlin, 1952), vol. 1, ch. 31, 276-375. Greek text of both fragments (B) and testimonia (A) with German translation.
  • Wright, M. R. (2nd edn.), Empedocles the Extant Fragments (London, 1995). With Greek text, English translation, introduction and commentary.
  • Inwood, B. The Poem of Empedocles (Toronto, 1992). With Greek text, facing English translation and introduction.
  • Martin, A. and O. Primavesi, L'Empédocle de Strasbourg: (P. Strasb. gr. Inv. 1665-1666) (Berlin/Strasbourg, 1998). With Greek text, French and English translations, introduction, commentary, and English summary.

b. Studies

  • Gemelli Marciano, L. "Le 'demonologie' empedoclee: problemi di metodo e altro", Aevum Antiquum 1 (2003), 205-35
  • Gemelli Marciano, L. Le metamorfosi della tradizione: mutamenti de significato e neologismi nel Peri physeos di Empedocle (Bari, 1999).
  • Guthrie, W.K.C. A History of Greek Philosophy vol. 2 (Cambridge 1969), ch. 3
  • Kingsley, P. Ancient Philosophy, Mystery and Magic: Empedocles and Pythagorean Tradition (Oxford, 1995)
  • Kirk, G. S. and J.E. Raven, M. Schofield, (2nd edn.), The Presocratic Philosophers (Cambridge 1983), ch. 10.
  • O'Brien, D. Empedocles’ Cosmic Cycle (Cambridge, 1969)
  • Osborne, C. 'Empedocles recycled', Classical Quarterly NS 37 (1987), 24-50
  • Osbourne, C. 'Rummaging in the recycling bins of Upper Egypt: a discussion of A. Martin and O. Primavesi, ZL' Empédocle de Strasbourg', Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy 18 (Oxford, 2000), 329-56.
  • Sedley, D. N. 'Empedocles' life cycles’, in Proceedings of the Symposium Tertium Mykonense (forthcoming, 2004)
  • Solmsen, F. 'Love and Strife in Empedocles' cosmology’, Phronesis 10 (1965), 123-45; repr. in R.E. Allen and D.J. Furley (eds), Studies in Presocratic Philosophy, (London, 1975), vol. 2, 221-64.
  • Trépanier, S. 'Empedocles on the ultimate symmetry of the world', Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy 24 (2003), 1-57
  • Trépanier, S. Empedocles: An Interpretation (London, 2004)

Author Information

Gordon Campbell
National University of Ireland, Maynooth

Epictetus (55–135 C.E.)

epictetusEpictetus (pronounced Epic-TEE-tus) was an exponent of Stoicism who flourished in the early second century C.E. about four hundred years after the Stoic school of Zeno of Citium was established in Athens. He lived and worked, first as a student in Rome, and then as a teacher with his own school in Nicopolis in Greece. Our knowledge of his philosophy and his method as a teacher comes to us via two works composed by his student Arrian, the Discourses and the Handbook. Although Epictetus based his teaching on the works of the early Stoics (none of which survives) which dealt with the three branches of Stoic thought, logic, physics and ethics, the Discourses and the Handbook concentrate almost exclusively on ethics. The role of the Stoic teacher was to encourage his students to live the philosophic life, whose end was eudaimonia ('happiness' or 'flourishing'), to be secured by living the life of reason, which – for Stoics – meant living virtuously and living 'according to nature'. The eudaimonia ('happiness') of those who attain this ideal consists of ataraxia (imperturbability), apatheia (freedom from passion), eupatheiai ('good feelings'), and an awareness of, and capacity to attain, what counts as living as a rational being should. The key to transforming oneself into the Stoic sophos (wise person) is to learn what is 'in one's power', and this is 'the correct use of impressions' (phantasiai), which in outline involves not judging as good or bad anything that appears to one. For the only thing that is good is acting virtuously (that is, motivated by virtue), and the only thing that is bad is the opposite, acting viciously (that is, motivated by vice). Someone who seeks to make progress as a Stoic (a prokoptôn) understands that their power of rationality is a fragment of God whose material body – a sort of rarefied fiery air – blends with the whole of creation, intelligently forming and directing undifferentiated matter to make the world as we experience it. The task of the prokoptôn, therefore, is to 'live according to nature', which means (a) pursuing a course through life intelligently responding to one's own needs and duties as a sociable human being, but also (b) wholly accepting one's fate and the fate of the world as coming directly from the divine intelligence which makes the world the best that is possible.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Writings
    1. The Discourses
    2. The Handbook
  3. Epictetus' Stoicism
  4. Key Concepts
    1. The Promise of Philosophy
    2. What is Really Good
    3. What is in our Power
    4. Making Proper Use of Impressions
    5. The Three Topoi
      1. The Discipline of Desire
      2. The Discipline of Action
      3. The Discipline of Assent
    6. God
    7. On Living in Accord with Nature
    8. Metaphors for Life
    9. Making Progress
  5. Glossary of Terms
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Translations of Epictetus
    2. Translations of Hellenistic Philosophers, including the Stoics
    3. Items that Address Epictetus Specifically
    4. Items Addressing Stoic Philosophy and/or Hellenistic Ethics Generally
    5. Other Items on Hellenistic Philosophy Generally

1. Life

It is possible to draw only a basic sketch of Epictetus' life. Resources at our disposal include just a handful of references in the ancient texts, to which we can add the few allusions that Epictetus makes to his own life in the Discourses.

Epictetus was born in about 55 C.E. in Hierapolis in Phrygia (modern-day Pamukkale, in south-western Turkey). As a boy he somehow came to Rome as a slave of Epaphroditus who was a rich and powerful freedman, having himself been a slave of the Emperor Nero (he had been an administrative secretary). Whilst still a slave, Epictetus studied with the Stoic teacher Musonius Rufus.

There is a story told by the author Celsus (probably a younger contemporary of Epictetus) – quoted by the early Christian Origen (c.185–254) at Contra Celsum 7.53 – that when still a slave, Epictetus was tortured by his master who twisted his leg. Enduring the pain with complete composure, Epictetus warned Epaphroditus that his leg would break, and when it did break, he said, 'There, did I not tell you that it would break?' And from that time Epictetus was lame. The Suda (tenth century), however, although confirming that Epictetus was lame, attributes his affliction to rheumatism.

At some point Epictetus was manumitted, and in about 89, along with other philosophers then in Rome, was banished by the Emperor Domitian. He went to Nicopolis in Epirus (in north-western Greece) where he opened his own school which acquired a good reputation, attracting many upper-class Romans. One such student was Flavius Arrian (c.86–160) who would compose the Discourses and the Handbook, and who later served in public office under the Emperor Hadrian and made his mark as a respected historian (much of his writings survive). Origen (Contra Celsum 6.2) reports that Epictetus had been more popular in his day than had Plato in his. Aulus Gellius (c.125–c.165) reports that one of Marcus Aurelius' teachers, Herodes Atticus (c.101–177), considered Epictetus to be 'the greatest of Stoics' (Attic Nights 1.2.6).

Our sources report that Epictetus did not marry, had no children, and lived to an old age. With respect to marriage and children we may note the story from Lucian (Demonax 55) about the Cynic philosopher Demonax who had been a pupil of Epictetus. On hearing Epictetus exhort his students to marry and have children (for it was a philosopher's duty to provide a substitute ready for the time when they would die), he sarcastically asked Epictetus whether he could marry one of his daughters.

2. Writings

It appears that Epictetus wrote nothing himself. The works we have that present his philosophy were written by his student, Flavius Arrian. We may conjecture that the Discourses and the Handbook were written some time around the years 104–107, at the time when Arrian (born c.86) was most likely to have been a student.

Dobbin (1998), though, holds the view that the Discourses and the Handbook were actually written by Epictetus himself; the Suda does say, after all, that Epictetus 'wrote a great deal'. Dobbin is not entirely convinced by Arrian's claim in his dedicatory preface that he wrote down Epictetus' words verbatim; firstly, stenographic techniques at this time were primitive, and anyway were the preserve of civil servants; secondly, most of the discourses are too polished, and look too much like carefully crafted prose to be the product of impromptu discussions; and thirdly, some of the discourses (notably 1.29, 3.22 and 4.1) are too long for extempore conversations.

There is no way to resolve this question with certainty. Whether the texts we have do indeed represent a serious attempt to record Epictetus at work verbatim, whether draft texts were later edited and rewritten (as seems wholly likely), possibly by Epictetus, or whether Epictetus did in fact write the texts himself, drawing on his recollections as a lecturer with only occasional attempts at strictly verbatim accuracy, we shall never know. But what we can be certain of, regardless of who actually wrote the words onto the papyrus to make the first draft of the text as we have it today, is that those words were intended to present Stoic moral philosophy in the terms and the style that Epictetus employed as a teacher intent on bringing his students to philosophic enlightenment as the Stoics had understood this enterprise.

a. Discourses

Written in Koine Greek, the everyday contemporary form of the language, Epictetus' Discourses appear to record the exchanges between Epictetus and his students after formal teaching had concluded for the day. Internal textual evidence confirms that the works of the early Stoic philosophers (Zeno, Cleanthes and Chrysippus) were read and discussed in Epictetus' classes, but this aspect of Epictetus' teaching is not recorded by Arrian. What we have, then, are intimate, though earnest, discussions in which Epictetus aims to make his students consider carefully what the philosophic life – for a Stoic – consists in, and how to live it oneself. He discusses a wide range of topics, from friendship to illness, from fear to poverty, on how to acquire and maintain tranquillity, and why we should not be angry with other people.

Not all of the Discourses appear to have survived, as the ancient Byzantine scholar Photius (c.810–c.893) reports that the complete text originally comprised eight books, whereas all we have today are four books. Because the text, chapter by chapter, jumps to different topics and shows no orderly development, it is not readily apparent that anything is missing, and indeed, the reference to eight books may be mistaken (though another author, Aulus Gellius, at Attic Nights 19.1.14, refers to the fifth book of the Discourses). The range of topics is sufficiently broad for us to be reasonably confident that, even if some of the text has been lost, what we lack by and large repeats and revisits the material that we have in the book as it has come down to us. (To find translations of the Discourses on-line, please visit my 'Translations of Epictetus on the Internet' page at my BT site or my Geocities site.)

b. The Handbook

This little book appears to be an abstract of the Discourses, focusing on key themes in Epictetus' teaching of Stoic ethics. Some of the text is taken from the Discourses, and the fact that not all of it can be correlated with passages in the larger work supports the view that some of the Discourses has indeed been lost. (To find translations of the Handbook on-line, please visit my 'Translations of Epictetus on the Internet' page at my BT site or my Geocities site.)

3. Epictetus' Stoicism

The writings of the early Stoics, of Zeno (335–263 B.C.E.) the founder of the school, of Chrysippus (c.290–207 B.C.E.) the extremely influential third head of the Stoa, and of others, survive only as quoted fragments found in later works. The question arises as to what extent Epictetus preserved the original doctrines of the Stoic school, and to what extent, if any, he branched out with new emphases and innovations of his own. The nineteenth-century Epictetan scholar Adolf Bonhöffer (1998, 3) remarks: '[Epictetus] is completely free of the eclecticism of Seneca and Marcus Aurelius; and, compared with his teacher Musonius Rufus … his work reveals a considerably closer connection to Stoic doctrine and terminology as developed mainly by Chrysippus.' Evidence internal to the Discourses indicates that Epictetus was indeed faithful to the early Stoics. At 1.4.28–31, Epictetus praises Chrysippus in the highest terms, saying of him, 'How great the benefactor who shows the way! … who has discovered, and brought to light, and communicated, the truth to all, not merely of living, but of living well' (trans. Hard). It would be inconsistent, if not wholly ridiculous, to laud Chrysippus in such terms and then proceed to depart oneself from the great man's teaching. At 1.20.15, Epictetus quotes Zeno, and at 2.6.9–10 he quotes Chrysippus, to support his arguments. Aulus Gellius (Attic Nights 19.1.14) says that Epictetus' Discourses 'undoubtedly agree with the writings of Zeno and Chrysippus'.

Scholars are agreed that the 'doctrine of the three topics (topoi)' (fields of study) which we find in the Discourses originates with Epictetus (see Bonhöffer 1996, 32; Dobbin 1998, xvii; Hadot 1998, 83; More 1923, 107). Oldfather (1925, xxi, n. 1), in the introduction to his translation of the Discourses, remarks that 'this triple division … is the only notable original element … found in Epictetus, and it is rather a pedagogical device for lucid presentation than an innovation in thought'. Our enthusiasm for this division being wholly original to Epictetus should be tempered with a reading of extracts from Seneca's Moral Letters (75.8–18 and 89.14–15) where we also find a threefold division of ethics which, although not exactly similar to Epictetus' scheme, suggests the possibility that both Seneca and Epictetus drew on work by their predecessors that, alas, has not survived. Suffice it so say, what Epictetus teaches by means of his threefold division is wholly in accord with the principles of the early Stoics, but how he does this is uniquely his own method. The programme of study and exercises that Epictetus' students adhered to was in consequence different from the programme that was taught by his predecessors, but the end result, consisting in the special Stoic outlook on oneself and the world at large and the ability to 'live the philosophic life', was the same.

4. Key Concepts

a. The Promise of Philosophy

Epictetus, along with all other philosophers of the Hellenistic period, saw moral philosophy as having the practical purpose of guiding people towards leading better lives. The aim was to live well, to secure for oneself eudaimonia ('happiness' or 'a flourishing life'), and the different schools and philosophers of the period offered differing solutions as to how the eudaimôn life was to be won.

No less true of us today than it was for the ancients, few people are content with life (let alone wholly content), and what contributes to any contentment that may be enjoyed is almost certainly short-lived and transient.

The task for the Stoic teacher commences with the understanding that (probably) everyone is not eudaimôn for much, or even all, of the time; that there is a reason for this being the case and, most importantly, that there are solutions that can remedy this sorry state of affairs.

Indeed, Epictetus metaphorically speaks of his school as being a hospital to which students would come seeking treatments for their ills (Discourses 3.23.30). Each of us, in consequence merely of being human and living in society, is well aware of what comprise these ills. In the course of daily life we are beset by frustrations and setbacks of every conceivable type. Our cherished enterprises are hindered and thwarted, we have to deal with hostile and offensive people, and we have to cope with the difficulties and anxieties occasioned by the setbacks and illnesses visited upon our friends and relations. Sometimes we are ill ourselves, and even those who have the good fortune to enjoy sound health have to face the fact of their own mortality. In the midst of all this, only the rare few are blessed with lasting and rewarding relationships, and even these relationships, along with everything that constitutes a human life, are wholly transient.

But what is philosophy? Does it not mean making preparation to meet the things that come upon us? (Discourses 3.10.6, trans. Oldfather)

The ills we suffer, says Epictetus, result from mistaken beliefs about what is truly good. We have invested our hope in the wrong things, or at least invested it in the wrong way. Our capacity to flourish and be happy (to attain eudaimonia) is entirely dependent upon our own characters, how we dispose ourselves to ourselves, to others, and to events generally. What qualities our characters come to have is completely up to us. Therefore, how well we flourish is also entirely up to us.

b. What is Really Good

The central claim of Stoic ethics is that only the virtues and virtuous activities are good, and that the only evil is vice and actions motivated by vice (see Discourses 2.9.15 and 2.19.13). When someone pursues pleasure or wealth, say, believing these things to be good, the Stoics hold that this person has made a mistake with respect to the nature of the things pursued and the nature of their own being, for the Stoics deny that advantages such as pleasure and health (wealth and status, and so forth) are good, because they do not benefit those who possess them in all circumstances. Virtue, on the other hand, conceived as the capacity to use such advantages wisely, being the only candidate for that which is always beneficial, is held to be the only good thing (see Plato, Euthydemus 278e–281e and Meno 87c–89a).

Thus, the Stoics identify the eudaimôn ('happy') life as one that is motivated by virtue. The term we translate as 'virtue' (from the Latin virtus) is aretê, and means 'excellence'. To progress towards excellence as a human being, for Epictetus, means understanding the true nature of one's being and keeping one's prohairesis (moral character) in the right condition. Epictetus uses the term aretê only occasionally, and whereas the early Stoics spoke of striving for excellence as what was proper for a rational creature and required for eudaimonia ('happiness' or well-being), Epictetus speaks of striving to maintain one's prohairesis in proper order (see Discourses 1.4.18 and 1.29.1).

Although things such as material comfort, for instance, will be pursued by the Stoic student who seeks eudaimonia, they will do this in a different way from those not living the 'philosophic life' – for Stoics claim that everything apart from virtue (what is good) and vice (what is bad) is indifferent, that is, 'indifferent' with regard to being good or bad. It is how one makes use of indifferent things that establishes how well one is making progress towards aretê (moral excellence) and a eudaimôn ('happy') life.

Indifferent things are either 'preferred' or 'dispreferred'. Preferred are health and wealth, friends and family, and pretty much all those things that most people pursue as desirable for leading a flourishing life. Dispreferred are their opposites: sickness and poverty, social exclusion, and pretty much all those things that people seek to avoid as being detrimental for a flourishing life. Thus, the preferred indifferents have value for a Stoic, but not in terms of their being good: they have an instrumental value with respect to their capacities to contribute to a flourishing life as the objects upon which our virtuous actions are directed (see Discourses 1.29.2). The Stoic does not lament their absence, for their presence is not constitutive of eudaimonia. What is good is the virtuous use one makes of such preferred things should they be to hand, but no less good are one's virtuous dispositions in living as well as one may, even when they are lacking.

c. What is in our Power

To maintain our prohairesis (moral character) in the proper condition – the successful accomplishment of this being necessary and sufficient for eudaimonia ('happiness') – we must understand what is eph' hêmin ('in our power' or 'up to us'; see Discourses 1.22.9–16). If we do not do this, our prohairesis will remain in a faulty condition, for we will remain convinced that things such as wealth and status are good when they are really indifferent, troubled by frustrations and anxieties, subject to disturbing emotions we do not want and cannot control, all of which make life unpleasant and unrewarding, sometimes overwhelmingly so. This is why Epictetus remarks: 'This is the proper goal, to practise how to remove from one's life sorrows and laments, and cries of "Alas" and "Poor me", and misfortune and disappointment' (Discourses 1.4.23, trans. Dobbin).

No one is master of another's prohairesis [moral character], and in this alone lies good and evil. No one, therefore, can secure the good for me, or involve me in evil, but I alone have authority over myself in these matters. (Discourses 4.12.7–8, trans. Dobbin)

What is in our power, then, is the 'authority over ourselves' that we have regarding our capacity to judge what is good and what is evil. Outside our power are 'external things', which are 'indifferent' with respect to being good or evil. These indifferents, as we saw in the previous section, number those things that are conventionally deemed to be good and those that are conventionally deemed to be bad. Roughly, they are things that 'just happen', and they are not in our power in the sense that we do not have absolute control to make them occur just as we wish, or to make them have exactly the outcomes that we desire. Thus, for example, sickness is not in our power because it is not wholly up to us whether we get sick, and how often, nor whether we will recover quickly or indeed at all. Now, it makes sense to visit a doctor when we feel ill, but the competence of the doctor is not in our power, and neither is the effectiveness of any treatment that we might be offered. So generally, it makes sense to manage our affairs carefully and responsibly, but the ultimate outcome of any affair is, actually, not in our power.

What is in our power is the capacity to adapt ourselves to all that comes about, to judge anything that is 'dispreferred' not as bad, but as indifferent and not strong enough to overwhelm our strength of character.

The Handbook of Epictetus begins with these words:

Some things are up to us [eph' hêmin] and some things are not up to us. Our opinions are up to us, and our impulses, desires, aversions–in short, whatever is our own doing. Our bodies are not up to us, nor are our possessions, our reputations, or our public offices, or, that is, whatever is not our own doing. (Handbook 1.1, trans. White)

That is, we have power over our own minds. The opinions we hold of things, the intentions we form, what we value and what we are averse to are all wholly up to us. Although we may take precautions, whether our possessions are carried off by a thief is not up us (but the intention to steal, that of course is in the power of the thief), and our reputations, in whatever quarter, must be decided by what other people think of us, and what they do think is up to them. Remaining calm in the face of adversity and controlling our emotions no matter what the provocation (qualities of character that to this day are referred to as 'being stoical'), are accomplished in the full Stoic sense, for Epictetus, by making proper use of impressions.

d. Making Proper Use of Impressions

To have an impression is to be aware of something in the world. For example, I may look out of my window and have the impression of an airship floating over the houses in the distance. Whether there is really an airship there, half a mile off, or whether there is just a little helium-filled model tied to my garden gate by a bit of string, is a separate question. 'Making proper use of impressions' concerns how we move from the first thing, being aware of something or other, to the second thing, making a judgement that something or other is the case. The Stoic stands in sharp contrast to the non-Stoic, for when the latter faces some disaster, say (let us imagine that their briefcase has burst open and their papers are scattered by the wind all along the station platform and onto the track), they will judge this a terrible misfortune and have the appropriate emotional response to match. Epictetus would declare that this person has made the wrong use of their impression.

In the first place, do not allow yourself to be carried away by [the] intensity [of your impression]: but say, 'Impression, wait for me a little. Let me see what you are, and what you represent. Let me test you.' Then, afterwards, do not allow it to draw you on by picturing what may come next, for if you do, it will lead you wherever it pleases. But rather, you should introduce some fair and noble impression to replace it, and banish this base and sordid one. (Discourses 2.18.24–5, trans. Hard)

Few non-Stoics, ignorant of Epictetus' teaching, would do other than rush around after their papers, descending deeper and deeper into a panic, imagining their boss at work giving them a dressing down for losing the papers, making them work extra hours to make good the loss, and perhaps even dismissing them from their job. The Stoic, by contrast, tests their impression to see what the best interpretation should be: losing the papers is a dispreferred indifferent, to be sure, but having an accident of this sort is bound to happen once in a while, and is nothing to be troubled about. They will quietly gather up the papers they can, and instead of panicking with respect to facing their boss, they will rehearse a little speech about having had an accident and what it means to have lost the papers. If their boss erupts in a temper, well, that is a concern for the boss.

Our attaining the eudaimôn ('happy') life requires that we judge things in the right way, for 'what disturbs men's minds is not events but their judgements on events' (Handbook 5, trans. Matheson).

Remember that foul words or blows in themselves are no outrage, but your judgement that they are so. So when any one makes you angry, know that it is your own thought that has angered you. Wherefore make it your endeavour not to let your impressions carry you away. For if once you gain time and delay, you will find it easier to control yourself. (Handbook 20, trans. Matheson)

e. The Three Topoi

The three topoi (fields of study) establish activities in which the prokoptôn (Stoic student) applies their Stoic principles; they are practical exercises or disciplines that when successfully followed are constitutive of the eudaimôn ('happy') life which all rational beings are capable of attaining.

There are three areas of study, in which a person who is going to be good and noble must be trained. That concerning desires and aversions, so that he may never fail to get what he desires nor fall into what he would avoid. That concerning the impulse to act and not to act, and, in general, appropriate behaviour; so that he may act in an orderly manner and after due consideration, and not carelessly. The third is concerned with freedom from deception and hasty judgement, and, in general, whatever is connected with assent. (Discourses 3.2.1–2, trans. Hard)

Our capacity to employ these disciplines in the course of daily life is eph' hêmin ('in our power' or 'up to us') because they depend on our opinions, judgements, intentions and desires which concern the way we regard things over which our prohairesis (moral character) has complete control.

i. The Discipline of Desire

The first discipline concerns what someone striving for excellence as a rational being should truly believe is worthy of desire, which for the Stoics is that which is truly good, virtue and action motivated by virtue.

Of these [three areas of study], the principle, and most urgent, is that which has to do with the passions; for these are produced in no other way than by the disappointment of our desires, and the incurring of our aversions. It is this that introduces disturbances, tumults, misfortunes, and calamities; and causes sorrow, lamentation and envy; and renders us envious and jealous, and thus incapable of listening to reason. (Discourses 3.2.3, trans. Hard)

Epictetus remarks: 'When I see a man anxious, I say, What does this man want? If he did not want some thing which is not in his power, how could he be anxious?' (Discourses 2.13.1, trans. Long). Those things that most of us, most of the time, seek after as being desirable, what we consider will make our lives go well, are things that are not in our power, and thus the hope we have for securing these things is placed in the hands of others or in the hands of fate. And when we are thwarted in our efforts to gain what we desire we become frustrated (or depressed or envious or angry, or all of these things). To be afflicted with such 'passions', says Epictetus, is the only real source of misery for human beings. Instead of trying to relieve ourselves of these unpleasant emotions by pressing all the harder to secure what we desire, we should rather place our hope not in 'external' things that are not in our power, but in our own dispositions and moral character. In short, we should limit our desire to virtue and to becoming (to the best of our capacities) examples of 'excellence'. If we do not do this, the inevitable result is that we will continue to desire what we may fail to obtain or lose once we have it, and in consequence suffer the unhappiness of emotional disquiet (or worse). And as is the common experience of all people at some time or other, when we are in the grip of such emotions we run the risk of becoming blind to the best course of action, even when construed in terms of pursuing 'external' things.

The Stoic prokoptôn, in contrast, sets their hopes on excellence, recognising that this is where their power over things lies. They will still pursue those 'preferred indifferent external' things that are needed for fulfilling those functions and projects that they deem appropriate for them as individuals, and those they have obligations to meet. But they will not be distressed at setbacks or failure, nor at obstructive people, nor at other difficulties (illness, for instance), for none of these things is entirely up to them, and they engage in their affairs in full consciousness of this fact. It is in maintaining this consciousness of what is truly good (virtue), and awareness that the indifferent things are beyond their power, that makes this a discipline for the Stoic prokoptôn.

ii. The Discipline of Action

The second discipline concerns our 'impulses to act and not to act', that is, our motivations, and answers the question as to what we each should do as an individual in our own unique set of circumstances to successfully fulfil the role of a rational, sociable being who is striving for excellence.

The outcome of our actions is not wholly in our power, but our inclination to act one way rather than another, to pursue one set of objectives rather than others, this is in our power. The Stoics use the analogy of the archer shooting at a target to explain this notion. The ideal, of course, is to hit the centre of the target, though accomplishing this is not entirely in the archer's power, for she cannot be certain how the wind will deflect the arrow from its path, nor whether her fingers will slip, nor whether (for it is within the bounds of possibility) the bow will break. The excellent archer does all within her power to shoot well, and she recognises that doing her best is the best she can do. The Stoic archer strives to shoot excellently, and will not be disappointed if she shoots well but fails to hit the centre of the target. And so it is in life generally. The non-Stoic views their success in terms of hitting the target, whereas the Stoic views their success in terms of having shot well (see Cicero, On Ends 3.22).

The [second area of study] has to do with appropriate action. For I should not be unfeeling like a statue, but should preserve my natural and acquired relations as a man who honours the gods, as a son, as a brother, as a father, as a citizen. (Discourses 3.2.4, trans. Hard)

Appropriate acts are in general measured by the relations they are concerned with. 'He is your father.' This means that you are called upon to take care of him, give way to him in all things, bear with him if he reviles or strikes you.
'But he is a bad father.'
Well, have you any natural claim to a good father? No, only to a father.
'My brother wrongs me.'
Be careful then to maintain the relation you hold to him, and do not consider what he does, but what you must do if your purpose is to keep in accord with nature. (Handbook 30, trans. Matheson)

The actions we undertake, Epictetus says, should be motivated by the specific obligations that we have in virtue of who we are, our natural relations to others, and what roles we have adopted in our dealings with the wider community (see Discourses 2.10.7–13). Put simply, our interest to live well as rational beings obliges us to act virtuously, to be patient, considerate, gentle, just, self-disciplined, even-tempered, dispassionate, unperturbed, and when necessary, courageous. This returns us to the central Stoic notion that the eudaimôn ('happy') life is realised by those who are motivated by virtue. The Discipline of Action points out to the prokoptôn how this should be applied in our practical affairs.

Epictetus sums up the first two disciplines:

We must have these principles ready to hand. Without them we must do nothing. We must set our mind on this object: pursue nothing that is outside us, nothing that is not our own, even as He that is mighty has ordained: pursuing what lies within our will [prohairetika], and all else [i.e., indifferent things] only so far as it is given to us. Further, we must remember who we are, and by what name we are called, and must try to direct our acts [kathêkonta] to fit each situation and its possibilities.
We must consider what is the time for singing, what the time for play, and in whose presence: what will be unsuited to the occasion; whether our companions are to despise us, or we to despise ourselves: when to jest, and whom to mock at: in a word, how one ought to maintain one's character in society. Wherever you swerve from any of these principles, you suffer loss at once; not loss from without, but issuing from the very act itself. (Discourses 4.12.15–18, trans. Matheson)

The loss here is of course loss of eudaimonia.

Failing to 'remember who we are' will result in our failing to pursue those actions appropriate to our individual circumstances and commitments. Epictetus says that this happens because we forget what 'name' we have (son, brother, councillor, etc.), 'for each of these names, if rightly considered, always points to the acts appropriate to it' (Discourses 2.10.11, trans. Hard). To progress in the Discipline of Action, then, the prokoptôn must be conscious, moment by moment, of (a) which particular social role they are playing, and (b) which actions are required or appropriate for fulfilling that role to the highest standard.

iii. The Discipline of Assent

This exercise focuses on 'assenting to impressions', and continues the discussion already introduced in the section above on making proper use of impressions. 'Assent' translates the Greek sunkatathesis, which means 'approve', 'agree', or 'go along with'. Thus, when we assent to an impression (phantasia) we are committing ourselves to it as a correct representation of how things are, and are saying, 'Yes, this is how it is.' The Discipline of Assent, then, is an exercise applied to our impressions in which we interpret and judge them in order to move from having the impression of something or other, to a declaration that such-and-such is the case.

The third area of study has to do with assent, and what is plausible and attractive. For, just as Socrates used to say that we are not to lead an unexamined life [see Plato, Apology 38a], so neither are we to accept an unexamined impression, but to say, 'Stop, let me see what you are, and where you come from', just as the night-watch say, 'Show me your token.' (Discourses 3.12.14–15, trans. Hard)

Make it your study then to confront every harsh impression with the words, 'You are but an impression, and not at all what you seem to be'. Then test it by those rules that you possess; and first by this–the chief test of all–'Is it concerned with what is in our power or with what is not in our power?' And if it is concerned with what is not in our power, be ready with the answer that it is nothing to you. (Handbook 1.5, trans. Matheson)

And we should do this with a view to avoiding falling prey to subjective (and false) evaluations so that we can be free from deception and from making rash judgements about how to proceed in the first two disciplines. For if we make faulty evaluations we will end up (with respect to the first discipline) having desires for the wrong things (namely, 'indifferents'), and (with respect to the second discipline) acting inappropriately with regard to our duties and obligations. This is why Epictetus remarks that the third topic 'concerns the security of the other two' (Discourses 3.2.5, trans. Long).

Epictetus runs through a number of imaginary situations to show how we should be alert to the dangers of assenting to poorly evaluated impressions:

… We ought … to exercise ourselves daily to meet the impressions of our senses …. So-and-so's son is dead. Answer, 'That lies outside the sphere of the moral purpose, it is not an evil.' His father has disinherited So-and-so; what do you think of it? 'That lies outside the sphere of the moral purpose, it is not an evil.' Caesar has condemned him. 'That lies outside the sphere of the moral purpose, it is not an evil.' He was grieved at all this. 'That lies within the sphere of the moral purpose, it is an evil.' He has borne up under it manfully. 'That lies within the sphere of the moral purpose, it is a good.' Now, if we acquire this habit, we shall make progress; for we shall never give our assent to anything but that of which we get a convincing sense-impression. His son is dead. What happened? His son is dead. Nothing else? Not a thing. His ship is lost. What happened? His ship is lost. He was carried off to prison. What happened? He was carried off to prison. But the observation: 'He has fared ill,' is an addition that each man makes on his own responsibility. (Discourses 3.8.1–5, trans. Oldfather)

What we must avoid, then, is adding to our impressions immediately and without proper evaluation any notion that something good or bad is at hand. For the only thing that is good is moral virtue, and the only harm that anyone can come to is to engage in affairs motivated by vice. Thus, to see the loss of a ship as a catastrophe would count as assenting to the wrong impression, for the impression that we have is that of just a ship being lost. To take the extra step of declaring that this is a misfortune and harmful would be to assent to an impression that is not in fact present, and would be a mistake. The loss of a ship, for a Stoic, is nothing more than a dispreferred indifferent, and does not constitute a harm.

f. God

For Epictetus, the terms 'God', 'the gods', and 'Zeus' are used interchangeably, and they appear frequently in the Discourses. In the Handbook, God is discussed as the 'captain' who calls us back on board ship, the subsequent voyage being a metaphor for our departure from life (see Handbook 7). God is also portrayed as 'the Giver' to whom we should return all those things we have enjoyed on loan when we lose close relatives or friends who die, and when we lose our possessions through misfortune (see Discourses 4.10.16 and Handbook 11).

If the Stoic making progress (the prokoptôn) understands God, the universe, and themselves in the right way, they 'will never blame the gods, nor find fault with them' (Handbook 31.1, trans. Oldfather):

Will you be angry and discontented with the ordinances of Zeus, which he, with the Fates who spun in his presence the thread of your destiny at the time of your birth, ordained and appointed? (Discourses 1.12.25, trans. Hard)

Indeed, they will pray to God to lead them to the fate that He has assigned them:

Lead me, Zeus, and you too, Destiny,
Wherever I am assigned by you;
I'll follow and not hesitate,
But even if I do not wish to,
Because I'm bad, I'll follow anyway.
(Handbook 53, trans. White = extract from Cleanthes' Hymn to Zeus)

[For] God has stationed us to a certain place and way of life. (Discourses 1.9.24, trans. Dobbin)

Epictetus presents orthodox Stoic views on God. His justification for believing in God is expressed essentially along the lines of what we recognise as an argument from design. The order and harmony that we can perceive in the natural world (from astronomical events to the way plants grow and fruit in season) is attributed to a divine providence that orders and controls the entire cosmos intelligently and rationally (see Discourses 1.6.1–11, 1.14.1–6, 1.16.7–8 and 2.14.11/25–7). The Stoics were materialists, and God is conceived of as a type of fiery breath that blends perfectly with all other matter in the universe. In doing this, God transforms matter from undifferentiated 'stuff' into the varied forms that we see around us. This process is continuous, and God makes the world as it is, doing what it does, moment by moment. Just as the soul of a person is understood to bring alive and animate what would otherwise be dead and inert matter, so God is thought of as the 'soul of the world', and the universe is thought of as a sort of animal.

Stoics hold that the mind of each person is quite literally a fragment (apospasma) of God (see Discourses 2.8.11), and that the rationality that we each possess is in fact a fragment of God's rationality; and this Epictetus primarily identifies as the capacity we have to make proper use of impressions (see Discourses 1.1.12). Epictetus expresses this in terms of what God has 'given us'; He is conceived of as having constructed the universe in such a way that we have in our possession all that is within the compass of our own character or moral choice and nothing else, but this is no reason for complaint:

What has He given me for my own and subject to my authority, and what has He left for Himself? Everything within the sphere of the moral purpose He has given me, subjected them to my control, unhampered and unhindered. My body that is made of clay, how could He make that unhindered? Accordingly He has made it subject to the revolution of the universe–[along with] my property, my furniture, my house, my children, my wife. … But how should I keep them? In accordance with the terms upon which they have been given, and for as long as they can be given. But He who gave also takes away. …
And so, when you have received everything, and your very self, from Another [i.e., God], do you yet complain and blame the Giver, if He take something away from you? (Discourses 4.1.100–3, with omissions, trans. Oldfather)

The capacity that the prokoptôn has for understanding, accepting, and embracing this state of affairs, that this is indeed the nature of things, is another of the main foundation stones of Stoic ethics.

g. On Living in Accord with Nature

The outlook adopted and the activities performed by the Stoic student in pursuit of excellence, as detailed in the sections above, are frequently referred to collectively by Epictetus (following the Stoic tradition) as 'following nature' or 'living in harmony with nature'. The Stoic prokoptôn maintains his 'harmony with nature' by being aware of why he acts as he does in terms of both (a) what his appropriate actions are, and (b) accepting what fate brings. If, for example, the prokoptôn is berated unfairly by his brother, he will not respond with angry indignation, for this would be 'contrary to nature', for nature has determined how brothers should rightly act towards each other (see Discourses 3.10.19–20). The task the Stoic student shoulders is to pursue actions appropriate to him as a brother, despite all and any provocation to act otherwise (see Handbook 30). This, for Epictetus, is a major component of what it means to keep one's prohairesis (moral character) in harmony with nature (see Discourses 1.6.15, 3.1.25 and 3.16.15).

Keeping ourselves in harmony with nature requires that we focus on two things. Firstly, we must pay attention to our own actions so that we respond appropriately, and secondly we must pay attention to the world in which our actions take effect and which prompts those actions in the first place.

When you are about to undertake some action, remind yourself what sort of action it is. If you are going out for a bath, put before your mind what commonly happens at the baths: some people splashing you, some people jostling, others being abusive, and others stealing. So you will undertake this action more securely if you say to yourself, 'I want to have a bath and also to keep my choice [prohairesis] in harmony with nature.' And do likewise in everything you undertake. So, if anything gets in your way when you are having your bath, you will be ready to say, 'I wanted not only to have a bath but also to keep my choice [prohairesis] in harmony with nature; and I shall not keep it so if I get angry at what happens.' (Handbook 4, trans. Hard)

In this extract about going to the baths, Epictetus focuses more on accepting what fate brings, saying that we should anticipate the sorts of things that can happen, so that when they do we will not be surprised and will not be angry. In other situations, anticipation of trouble or misfortune is impossible, but all the same, the Stoic will accept their fate as what God has ordained for them, and this for Epictetus is the very essence of keeping in harmony with nature (see Discourses 1.4.18–21).

It is circumstances (difficulties) which show what men are. Therefore when a difficulty falls upon you, remember that God, like a trainer of wrestlers, has matched you with a rough young man. For what purpose? you may say. Why, that you may become an Olympic conqueror; but it is not accomplished without sweat. In my opinion no man has had a more profitable difficulty than you have had, if you choose to make use of it as an athlete would deal with a young antagonist. (Discourses 1.24.1–2, trans. Long)

Every problem we face in life should be understood as a new opportunity to strengthen our moral character, just as every new bout for the wrestler provides an opportunity for them to train their skill in wrestling.

To be instructed is this, to learn to wish that every thing may happen as it does. And how do things happen? As the disposer [i.e., God] has disposed them. And he has appointed summer and winter, and abundance and scarcity, and virtue and vice, and all such opposites for the harmony of the whole; and to each of us he has given a body, and parts of the body, and possessions, and companions.
Remembering then this disposition of things, we ought to go to be instructed, not that we may change the constitution of things, – for we have not the power to do it, nor is it better that we should have the power, – but in order that, as the things around us are what they are and by nature exist, we may maintain our minds in harmony with the things which happen. (Discourses 1.12.15–17, trans. Long)

The wise and good man … submits his own mind to him who administers the whole [i.e., God], as good citizens do to the law of the state. He who is receiving instruction ought to come to be instructed with this intention, How shall I follow the gods in all things, how shall I be contented with the divine administration, and how can I become free? For he is free to whom every thing happens according to his will [prohairesis], and whom no man can hinder. (Discourses 1.12.7–9, trans. Long)

In this last extract we see Epictetus refer to the ideal Stoic practice as that of 'following the gods'. This means essentially the same as 'following nature', for God, who is immanent in the world (as the Stoics understand it) is identified with the way the world manifests, so if one follows nature, one must also be following God (see Discourses 1.20.15, 1.30.4, 4.7.20 and 4.10.14).

h. Metaphors for Life

Epictetus employs a number of metaphors to illustrate what the Stoic attitude to life should be.


Life as a festival

Epictetus encourages us to think of life as a festival, arranged for our benefit by God, as something that we can live through joyously, able to put up with any hardships that befall us because we have our eye on the larger spectacle that is taking place. Epictetus asks his students:

Who are you, and for what purpose have you come? Was it not he [i.e., God] who brought you here? … And as what did he bring you here? Was it not as a mortal? Was it not as one who would live, with a little portion of flesh, upon this earth, and behold his governance and take part with him, for a short time, in his pageant and his festival? (Discourses 4.1.104, trans. Hard)

The whole thrust of Stoic ethics aims to persuade us that we should ourselves contribute to the festival by living as well as we may and fulfilling our duties as sociable citizens of God's 'great city of the universe' (Discourses 3.22.4, trans. Hard). (See also Discourses 1.12.21, 2.14.23 and 4.4.24–7/46.)


Life as a game

. At Discourses 2.5.2, in encouraging his students to appreciate that external things are indifferent (being neither good nor bad), Epictetus says that we should imitate those who play dice, for neither the dice nor the counters have any real value; what matters, and what is either good or bad, is the way we play the game. Similarly at 2.5.15–20, where Epictetus discusses the example of playing a ball game, no one considers for a moment whether the ball itself is good or bad, but only whether they can throw and catch it with the appropriate skill. What matters are the faculties of dexterity, speed and good judgement exhibited by the players, for it is in deploying these faculties effectively that any player is deemed to have played well. (See also Discourses 4.7.5/19/30–1.) Epictetus also uses the metaphor of playing games when discussing suicide, for just as someone stops playing a game when they are no longer amused by it, so it should be in life generally: if life should become unbearable, no one can force us to keep living it.

To summarize: remember that the door is open. Do not be more cowardly than children, but just as they say, when the game no longer pleases them, 'I will play no more,' you too, when things seem that way to you, should merely say, 'I will play no more,' and so depart; but if you stay, stop moaning. (Discourses 1.24.20, trans. Hard; see also 1.25.7–21 and 2.16.37)


Life as weaving

. In this metaphor, the wool that the weaver uses to make cloth takes the place of the ball in the game; that is, whatever material comes our way, it is our duty to make proper use of it, and if possible make it into the best thing of its kind as we can (see Discourses 2.5.21–2).

Life as a play

. We have already seen, when discussing the Discipline of Action, that Epictetus urges us to 'remember who we are' and what 'name' we have, because what role we play in life will determine which actions are appropriate for us. Obviously, the metaphor of life as a play expands on this idea, but also brings in the notion of our having to accept our fate, whatever that may be, since we do not ourselves chose the role we must play (for although we may aim for one role rather than another, we must recognise that our attaining it is not, in fact, 'in our power').

Remember that you are an actor in a play, which is as the author [i.e., God] wants it to be: short, if he wants it to be short; long, if he wants it to be long. If he wants you to act a poor man, a cripple, a public official, or a private person, see that you act it with skill. For it is your job to act well the part that is assigned to you; but to choose it is another's. (Handbook 17, trans. Hard)


Life as an athletic contest

. This metaphor invites us to see an analogy between one's training in Stoic ethics as preparatory for living the philosophic life and someone's training in athletics as preparatory for entering the contest in the arena. Epictetus addresses someone who has become distressed at not having enough leisure to study their philosophy books, saying:

For is not reading a kind of preparation for living, but living itself made up of things other than books? It is as if an athlete, when he enters the stadium, should break down and weep because he is not exercising outside. This is what you were exercising for; this is what the jumping-weights, and the sand and your young partners were all for. So are you now seeking for these, when it is the time for action? That is just as if, in the sphere of assent, when we are presented with impressions, some of which are evidently true and others not, instead of distinguishing between them, we should want to read a treatise On Direct Apprehension. (Discourses 4.4.11–13, trans. Hard)

Training to live a life that befits someone who strives for the Stoic ideal is directly compared to athletic training. Such training is difficult, demanding, and unpleasant; there is little point in showing eagerness for any endeavour if we have not properly assessed the demands that will be placed upon us, and in inevitably losing our original enthusiasm we will look foolish. This applies to philosophic training no less than to training as a wrestler in preparation for competing in the Olympic games (see Discourses 3.15.1–13 = Handbook 29). Elsewhere, Epictetus declares that delay is no longer possible, that we must meet the challenges that life throws at us:

Therefore take the decision right now that you must live as a full-grown man, as a man who is making progress; and all that appears to be best must be to you a law that cannot be transgressed. And if you are confronted with a hard task or with something pleasant, or with something held in high repute or no repute, remember that the contest is now, and that the Olympic games are now, and that it is no longer possible to delay the match, and that progress is lost and saved as a result of one defeat and even one moment of giving in. (Handbook 51.2, trans. Boter; see also Discourses 1.4.13–17, 1.18.21–3, 1.24.1–2 and 3.25.3)


Life as military service

. This metaphor returns us to the Stoic idea that the universe is governed by God, and that, like it or not, we are all in service to God. The Stoic prokoptôn (student making progress) should understand that they should live life attempting to discharge this service to the highest standards. Epictetus addresses the person who is upset that they are obliged to travel abroad, causing their mother to be distressed at their absence.

Do you not know that life is a soldier's service? One man must keep guard, another go out to reconnoitre, another take the field. It is not possible for all to stay where they are, nor is it better so. But you neglect to fulfil the orders of the general and complain, when some severe order is laid upon you; you do not understand to what a pitiful state you are bringing the army so far as in you lies; you do not see that if all follow your example there will be no one to dig a trench, or raise a palisade, no one to keep night watch or fight in the field, but every one will seem an unserviceable soldier.
… So too it is in the world; each man's life is a campaign, and a long and varied one. It is for you to play the soldier's part–do everything at the General's bidding, divining his wishes, if it be possible. (Discourses 3.24.31–5, trans. Matheson; see also 1.9.24 and 1.16.20–1)

i. Making Progress

In making progress, the Stoic prokoptôn will pay a price. In standing to God, the world, society, herself and her undertakings in this new way (by accepting the Stoic notions of what is truly good, what is truly up to her, where her proper duties lie, and in considering her life to be one of service to God), the prokoptôn separates herself from the rest of society in fairly marked, if not profound, ways. For example, Epictetus wants his students to enjoy and participate in the 'festival of life', yet at the public games (for instance) they must not support any one individual, but must wish the winner to be he who actually wins; they must refrain entirely from shouting or laughing, and must not get carried away by the spectacle of the contest (Handbook 33.10). So whilst the prokoptôn's friends immerse themselves fully in the games, cheering on their man and jeering at his opponent, the Stoic stands aloof and detached. Deliberately separating herself from the crowd is the price she pays for well-being (eudaimonia), dispassion (apatheia), tranquillity and imperturbability (ataraxia), along with the conviction that she is living as God intends.

But having declared her hand, the prokoptôn will pay in other ways also, for those around her will rebuke and ridicule her (Handbook 22), for in abandoning the values and practices common to the wider community, she will provoke hostility and suspicion. Yet there remains the hope that some at least will see the prokoptôn as someone whose wisdom has value for the community at large, as someone who serves as an example of how one may get along in the world without being overwhelmed by it, as someone with specific skills to offer, such as mediating family disputes and suchlike (see Discourses 1.15.5).

Epictetus characterises the differences between the non-philosopher and someone making progress in these terms:

This is the position and character of a layman: He never looks for either help or harm from himself, but only from externals. This is the position and character of the philosopher: He looks for all his help or harm from himself.
Signs of one who is making progress are: He censures no one, praises no one, blames no one, finds fault with no one, says nothing about himself as though he were somebody or knew something. When he is hampered or prevented, he blames himself. And if anyone compliments him, he smiles to himself at the person complimenting; while if anyone censures him, he makes no defence. He goes about like an invalid, being careful not to disturb, before it has grown firm, any part which is getting well. He has put away from himself every desire, and has transferred his aversion to those things only, of what is under our control [eph' hêmin], which are contrary to nature. He exercises no pronounced choice in regard to anything. If he gives the appearance of being foolish or ignorant he does not care. In a word, he keeps guard against himself as though he were his own enemy lying in wait. (Handbook 48.1–3, trans. Oldfather)

Epictetus' life as a Stoic teacher can perhaps be regarded as a personal quest to awaken to true philosophic enlightenment that person who will stand up proudly when his teacher pleads:

Pray, let somebody show me a person who is in such a good way that he can say, 'I concern myself only with what is my own, with what is free from hindrance, and is by nature free. That is what is truly good, and this I have. But let all else be as god may grant; it makes no difference to me.' (Discourses 4.13.24, trans. Hard)

For having attained such enlightenment himself (for surely this we must suppose), Epictetus devoted his life to raising up others from the crowd of humanity who could stand beside him and share in a perception of the universe and a way of life that any rational being is obliged to adopt in virtue of the nature of things.

5. Glossary of Terms

adiaphora 'indifferent'; any of those things that are neither good or bad, everything, in fact, that does not fall under the headings 'virtue' or 'vice'. The indifferents are what those lacking Stoic wisdom frequently take to have value (either positive or negative), and hence take to be desirable or undesirable. Pursuing them, or trying to avoid them, can lead to disturbing emotions that undermine one's capacity to lead a eudaimôn life.



freedom from passion, a constituent of the eudaimôn life.


aversion; the opposite of hormê.


any 'dispreferred' indifferent, including such things as sickness, poverty, social exclusion, and so forth (conventionally 'bad' things). Suffering any of the dispreferred indifferents does not detract from the eudaimôn life enjoyed by the Stoic sophos. See proêgmena.

appropriate action

see kathêkon.


'excellence' or virtue; in the context of Stoic ethics the possession of 'moral excellence' will secure eudaimonia. For Epictetus, one acquires this by learning the correct use of impressions, following God, and following nature.


training or exercise undertaken by the Stoic prokoptôn striving to become a Stoic sophos.


see sunkatathesis and phantasiai (impressions).


imperturbability, literally 'without trouble', sometimes translated as 'tranquillity'; a state of mind that is a constituent of the eudaimôn life.


see kathêkon.


avoidance; opposite of orexis.


'external'; any of those things that fall outside the preserve of one's prohairesis, including health, wealth, sickness, life, death, pain – what Epictetus calls aprohaireta, which are not in our power, the 'indifferent' things.


see pathos.


see telos.

eph' hêmin

what is in our power, or 'up to us' – namely, the correct use of impressions.


'happiness' or 'flourishing' or 'living well'. One achieves this end by learning the correct use of impressions following God, and following nature.


'good feelings', possessed by the Stoic wise person (sophos) who experiences these special sorts of emotions, but does not experience irrational and disturbing passions.


see aretê.

external thing

see ektos.


see theos.


'commanding faculty' of the soul (psuchê); the centre of consciousness, the seat of all mental states, thought by the Stoics (and other ancients) to be located in the heart. It manifests four mental powers: the capacity to receive impressions, to assent to them, form intentions to act in response to them, and to do these things rationally. The Discourses talk of keeping the prohairesis in the right condition, and also of keeping the hêgemonikon in the right condition, and for Epictetus these notions are essentially interchangeable.


impulse to act; that which motivates an action.


see phantasiai.


see adiaphora.


any 'appropriate action', 'proper function', or 'duty' undertaken by someone aiming to do what befits them as a responsible, sociable person. The appropriate actions are the subject of the second of the three topoi.


a 'right action' or 'perfect action' undertaken by the Stoic sophos, constituted by an appropriate action performed virtuously.


'desire' properly directed only at virtue.


see pathos.


any of the disturbing emotions or 'passions' experienced by those who lack Stoic wisdom and believe that externals really are good or bad, when in fact they are 'indifferent'. A pathos according to the Stoics is a false judgement based on a misunderstanding of what is truly good and bad.


'impressions', what we are aware of in virtue of having experiences. Whereas non-rational animals respond to their impressions automatically (thus 'using' them), over and above using our impressions, human beings, being rational, can 'attend to their use' and, with practice, assent or not assent to them as we deem appropriate. The capacity to do this is what Epictetus strives to teach his students.


nature. To acquire eudaimonia one must 'follow nature', which means accepting our own fate and the fate of the world, as well as understanding what it means to be a rational being and strive for virtue. See aretê and God.


any 'preferred' indifferent, conventionally taken to be good, including such things as health and wealth, taking pleasure in the company of others, and so forth. Enjoying any of the preferred indifferents is not in itself constitutive of the eudaimôn life sought by the Stoic prokoptôn. See apoproêgmena.


'moral character', the capacity that rational beings have for making choices and intending the outcomes of their actions, sometimes translated as will, volition, intention, choice, moral choice, moral purpose. This faculty is understood by Stoics to be essentially rational. It is the faculty we use to 'attend to impressions' and to give (or withhold) assent to impressions.


one who is making progress (prokopê) in living as a Stoic, which for Epictetus means above all learning the correct use of impressions.

proper function

see kathêkon.

right action

see katorthôma.


the Stoic wise person who values only aretê and enjoys a eudaimôn life. The sophos enjoys a way of engaging in life that the prokoptôn strives to emulate and attain.


assent; a capacity of the prohairesis to judge the significance of impressions.


disturbance, trouble; what one avoids when one enjoys ataraxia.


end; that which we should pursue for its own sake and not for the sake of any other thing. For the Stoic, this is virtue. Epictetus formulates the end in several different but closely related ways. He says that the end is to maintain one's prohairesis in proper order, to follow God, and to follow nature, all of which count as maintaining a eudaimôn life. The means by which this is to be accomplished is to apply oneself to the 'three disciplines' assiduously.


God, who is material, is a sort of fiery breath that blends with undifferentiated matter to create the forms that we find in the world around us. He is supremely rational, and despite our feelings to the contrary, makes the best world that it is possible to make. Epictetus says that we should 'follow God', that is, accept the fate that He bestows on us and on the world. Stoics understand that the rationality enjoyed by every human being (and any other rational beings, should there be any) is literally a fragment of God.


'topics'. The 'three topics' or 'fields of study' which we find elucidated in the Discourses is an original feature of Epictetus' educational programme. The three fields of study are: (1) The Discipline of Desire, concerned with desire and avoidance (orexis and ekklisis), and what is really good and desirable (virtue, using impressions properly, following God, and following nature); (2) The Discipline of Action, concerned with impulse and aversion (hormê and aphormê), and our 'appropriate actions' or 'duties' with respect to living in our communities in ways that befit a rational being; and (3) The Discipline of Assent, concerned with how we should judge our impressions so as not to be carried away by them into anxiety or disturbing emotions with the likelihood of failing in the first two Disciplines.


from the Latin virtus which translates the Greek aretê, 'excellence'.


the name for God; Epictetus uses the terms 'Zeus', 'God', and 'the gods' interchangeably.

6. References and Further Reading

a. Translations of Epictetus

(Note: 'Enchiridion', 'Encheiridion', 'Handbook', and 'Manual' all refer to the same work. Items in print and currently available are indicated with an asterisk*.)

  • *Boter, Gerard. 1999. The Encheiridion of Epictetus & its Three Christian Adaptations: Transmission & Critical Editions. Leiden: Brill.
  • *Dobbin, Robert. 1998. Epictetus: Discourses Book 1. Oxford: Clarendon.
    • Includes commentary.
  • *Hard, Robin. 1995. The Discourses of Epictetus. ed. with introduction and notes by Christopher Gill. London: Everyman/Dent.
    • Includes the complete Discourses, The Handbook, and Fragments.
  • Higginson, Thomas Wentworth. 1890. The Works of Epictetus Consisting of His Discourses, in Four Books, The Enchiridion, and Fragments. Boston: Little, Brown, & Company.
  • Higginson, Thomas Wentworth. 1944. Epictetus: Discourses and Enchiridion. Roslyn, NY: Walter J. Black.
    • Reprint of the nineteenth-century translation with minor editorial alterations.
  • *Higginson, Thomas Wentworth. 1948. The Enchiridion. Upper Saddle River, NJ: Prentice Hall.
    • Reprint of nineteenth-century translation.
  • *Lobell, Sharon. 1995. Epictetus: The Art of Living. The Classic Manual on Virtue, Happiness, and Effectiveness: A New Interpretation. San Francisco: HarperSanFrancisco.
    • A free paraphrase of the Handbook.
  • Long, George. 1890. The Discourses of Epictetus with the Encheiridion and Fragments. London: George Bell.
    • First published 1848.
  • *Long, George. 1991. Enchiridion. Amherst, NY: Prometheus.
    • Reprint of nineteenth-century translation.
  • Matheson, P. E. 1916. Epictetus: The Discourses and Manual. 2 vols. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • *Matson, Wallace I. 1998. Epictetus: Encheiridion. in Louis P. Pojman. ed. Classics of Philosophy: Volume 1, Ancient and Medieval. New York: Oxford University Press.
  • *Oldfather, W. A. 1925, 1928. Epictetus: The Discourses as Reported by Arrian, The Manual, and Fragments. 2 vols. Cambridge, MA: Loeb Classical Library, Harvard University Press.
    • With original Greek text facing English translation.
  • *Saunders, Jason L. ed. 1996. Greek and Roman Philosophy after Aristotle. New York: Free Press.
    • Readings from Epicureanism, Stoicism, Scepticism, Philo, Plotinus, and early Christian thought. Includes P. E. Matheson's translation of the Manual of Epictetus.
  • *White, Nicholas. 1983. Handbook of Epictetus. Indianapolis: Hackett.
    • A very competent and readable translation, with notes and a helpful, clear introduction.

b. Translations of Hellenistic Philosophers, including the Stoics

  • Inwood, Brad and L. P. Gerson. 1997. Hellenistic Philosophy: Introductory Readings. 2nd edition. Indianapolis: Hackett.
    • Readings from the main schools: Epicureanism, Stoicism and Scepticism.
  • Long, A. A. and D. N. Sedley. 1987. The Hellenistic Philosophers, Volume 1. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
    • Readings from the main schools: Epicureanism, Stoicism, Scepticism, and the Academics. Includes commentaries on the readings. This is the standard primary source text. Volume 2 contains the original Greek and Latin.

c. Items that Address Epictetus Specifically

  • Bonhöffer, Adolf Friedrich. 1996. The Ethics of the Stoic Epictetus. trans. William O. Stephens. New York: Peter Lang.
    • A very nicely done translation of this significant nineteenth-century work first published in 1894.
  • Hijmans, B. L. 1959. Askesis: Notes on Epictetus' Educational System. Assen: Van Gorcum.
  • Long, A. A. 2002. Epictetus: A Stoic and Socratic Guide to Life. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Stephens, William O. 1996. Epictetus on How the Stoic Sage Loves. Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy 14: 193–210.
    • A very clear, scholarly survey of Epictetus' ethics.
  • Stockdale, James Bond. 1993. Courage Under Fire: Testing Epictetus's Doctrines in a Laboratory of Human Behavior. Stanford: Hoover Institution/Stanford University.
    • An account of how the author used the principles of Stoic ethics to survive the rigors of a Vietnamese prisoner of war camp.
  • Xenakis, Jason. 1969. Epictetus: Philosopher–Therapist. The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff.

d. Items Addressing Stoic Philosophy and/or Hellenistic Ethics Generally

  • Annas, Julia. 1995. The Morality of Happiness. New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Gould, Josiah B. 1970. The Philosophy of Chrysippus. Albany, NY: State University of New York Press.
  • Hadot, Pierre. 1995. Philosophy as a Way of Life. Oxford: Blackwell.
    • Engaging essays on the notion of philosophy as a way of life, with focus on Stoic practice.
  • Hadot, Pierre. 1998. The Inner Citadel: The Mediations of Marcus Aurelius. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
    • Contains a very helpful chapter on Epictetus.
  • Inwood, Brad. 1985. Ethics and Human Action in Early Stoicism. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Lesses, Glen. 1989. Virtue and the Goods of Fortune in Stoic Moral Theory. Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy 7: 95–127.
  • Lesses, Glen. 1993. Austere Friends: The Stoics and Friendship. Apeiron 26: 57–75.
  • Long, A. A. 1986. Hellenistic Philosophy: Stoics, Epicureans, Sceptics. 2nd ed. Berkeley and Los Angeles: University of California Press.
  • More, Paul Elmer. 1923. Hellenistic Philosophies. Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
  • Nussbaum, Martha C. 1994. The Therapy of Desire: Theory and Practice in Hellenistic Ethics. Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
    • Contains very helpful chapters on Stoic ethics from the view point of philosophy as therapy, as the ancients conceived it.
  • Reale, Giovanni. 1990. A History of Ancient Philosophy: 4. The Schools of the Imperial Age. ed. & trans. John R. Catan. Albany, NY: State University of New York Press.
  • Sandbach, F. H. 1989. The Stoics. London: Duckworth and Indianapolis: Hackett.
  • Sharples, R. W. 1996. Stoics, Epicureans, and Sceptics: An Introduction to Hellenistic Philosophy. London: Routledge.
  • Striker, Gisela. 1990. Ataraxia: Happiness as Tranquillity. The Monist 73–1: 97–110. also in Striker 1996
  • Striker, Gisela. 1991. Following Nature: A Study in Stoic Ethics. Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy 9: 1–73. also in Striker 1996.
  • Striker, Gisela. 1996. Essays on Hellenistic Epistemology and Ethics. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

e. Other items on Hellenistic philosophy generally

  • Algra, Keimpe, et al. eds. 1999. The Cambridge History of Hellenistic Philosophy. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Annas, Julia. 1992. Hellenistic Philosophy of Mind. Berkeley and Los Angeles: University of California Press.

Author Information

Keith H. Seddon
Warnborough College

Epicurus (341—271 B.C.E.)

epicurus2Epicurus is one of the major philosophers in the Hellenistic period, the three centuries following the death of Alexander the Great in 323 B.C.E. (and of Aristotle in 322 B.C.E.). Epicurus developed an unsparingly materialistic metaphysics, empiricist epistemology, and hedonistic ethics. Epicurus taught that the basic constituents of the world are atoms, uncuttable bits of matter, flying through empty space, and he tried to explain all natural phenomena in atomic terms. Epicurus rejected the existence of Platonic forms and an immaterial soul, and he said that the gods have no influence on our lives. Epicurus also thought skepticism was untenable, and that we could gain knowledge of the world relying upon the senses. He taught that the point of all one's actions was to attain pleasure (conceived of as tranquility) for oneself, and that this could be done by limiting one's desires and by banishing the fear of the gods and of death. Epicurus' gospel of freedom from fear proved to be quite popular, and communities of Epicureans flourished for centuries after his death.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Sources
  3. Metaphysics
    1. Arguments for the Existence of Atoms and Void
    2. Properties of Atoms, Limitlessness of the Universe
    3. Differences from Democritus
      1. Weight
      2. The Swerve
      3. Sensible Qualities
    4. Mechanistic Explanations of Natural Phenomena
    5. The Gods
    6. Philosophy of Mind
    7. Perception
  4. Epistemology
    1. The Canon: Sensations, Preconceptions, and Feelings
    2. Anti-skeptical Arguments
      1. The "Lazy Argument"
      2. The Self-refutation Argument
      3. The Argument from Concept-formation
  5. Ethics
    1. Hedonism, Psychological and Ethical
    2. Types of Pleasure
    3. Types of Desire
    4. The Virtues
    5. Justice
    6. Friendship
    7. Death
      1. The No Subject of Harm Argument
      2. The Symmetry Argument
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Collections of Primary Sources
    2. Recent Books on Particular Areas of Epicurus' Philosophy

1. Life

Epicurus was born around 341 B.C.E., seven years after Plato's death, and grew up in the Athenian colony of Samos, an island in the Mediterranean Sea. He was about 19 when Aristotle died, and he studied philosophy under followers of Democritus and Plato. Epicurus founded his first philosophical schools in Mytilene and Lampsacus, before moving to Athens around 306 B.C.E. There Epicurus founded the Garden, a combination of philosophical community and school. The residents of the Garden put Epicurus' teachings into practice. Epicurus died from kidney stones around 271 or 270 B.C.E.

After Epicurus' death, Epicureanism continued to flourish as a philosophical movement. Communities of Epicureans sprang up throughout the Hellenistic world; along with Stoicism, it was one of the major philosophical schools competing for people's allegiances. Epicureanism went into decline with the rise of Christianity. Certain aspects of Epicurus' thought were revived during the Renaissance and early modern periods, when reaction against scholastic neo-Aristotelianism led thinkers to turn to mechanistic explanations of natural phenomena.

2. Sources

Epicurus was a voluminous writer, but almost none of his own work survives. A likely reason for this is that Christian authorities found his ideas ungodly. Diogenes Laertius, who probably lived in the third century CE , wrote a 10-book Lives of the Philosophers, which includes three of Epicurus' letters in its recounting of the life and teachings of Epicurus. These three letters are brief summaries of major areas of Epicurus' philosophy: the Letter to Herodotus, which summarizes his metaphysics, the Letter to Pythocles, which gives atomic explanations for meteorological phenomena, and the Letter to Menoeceus, which summarizes his ethics. It also includes the Principal Doctrines, 40 sayings which deal mainly with ethical matters.

Because of the absence of Epicurus' own writings, we have to rely on later writers to reconstruct Epicurus' thought. Two of our most important sources are the Roman poet Lucretius (c. 94-55 B.C.E.) and the Roman politician Cicero (106-43 B.C.E.). Lucretius was an Epicurean who wrote De Rerum Natura (On the Nature of Things), a six-book poem expounding Epicurus' metaphysics. Cicero was an adherent of the skeptical academy, who wrote a series of works setting forth the major philosophical systems of his day, including Epicureanism. Another major source is the essayist Plutarch (c. 50-120 CE), a Platonist. However, both Cicero and Plutarch were very hostile toward Epicureanism, so they must be used with care, since they often are less than charitable toward Epicurus, and may skew his views to serve their own purposes.

Although the major outlines of Epicurus' thought are clear enough, the lack of sources means many of the details of his philosophy are still open to dispute.

3. Metaphysics

Epicurus believes that the basic constituents of the world are atoms (which are uncuttable, microscopic bits of matter) moving in the void (which is simply empty space). Ordinary objects are conglomerations of atoms. Furthermore, the properties of macroscopic bodies and all of the events we see occurring can be explained in terms of the collisions, reboundings, and entanglements of atoms.

a. Arguments for the Existence of Atoms and Void

Epicurus' metaphysics starts from two simple points: (1) we see that there are bodies in motion, and (2) nothing comes into existence from what does not exist. Epicurus takes the first point to be simply a datum of experience. The second point is a commonplace of ancient Greek philosophy, derived from the Principle of Sufficient Reason (the principle that for everything which occurs there is a reason or explanation for why it occurs, and why this way rather than that).

First, because bodies move, there must be empty space for them to move in, and Epicurus calls this empty space 'void.' Second, the ordinary bodies that we see are compound bodies--that is, bodies which are made up of further bodies, which is shown by the fact that they can be broken down into smaller pieces. However, Epicurus thinks that this process of division cannot go on indefinitely, because otherwise bodies would dissolve away into nothing. Also, there must be basic and unchangeable building blocks of matter in order to explain the regularities in nature. These non-compound bodies are atoms--literally, 'uncuttables.' Only bodies and void exist per se, that is, exist without depending for their existence on something else. Other things--such as colors, time, and justice--are ultimately explicable as attributes of bodies.

b. Properties of Atoms, Limitlessness of the Universe

Because Epicurus believes that nothing comes into existence from nothing, he thinks that the universe has no beginning, but has always existed, and will always exist. Atoms, too, as the basic building blocks of all else, cannot come into existence, but have always existed. Our particular cosmos, however, is only a temporary agglomeration of atoms, and it is only one of an infinite number of such cosmoi, which come into existence and then dissolve away. Against Aristotle, Epicurus argues that the universe is unlimited in size. If the universe were limited in size, says Epicurus, you could go to the end of it, stick your fist out, and where your fist was located would be the new 'limit' of the universe. Of course, this process could be reiterated an endless number of times. Since the universe is unlimited in size, there must also be an unlimited number of atoms and an infinite amount of void. If the number of atoms were limited, then the 'density' of atoms in any region would effectively be zero, and there would be no macroscopic bodies, as there evidently are. And there must be an unlimited amount of void, since without a limitless amount of void, the infinite number of atoms would be unable to move.

c. Differences from Democritus

Up to this point, Epicurus is largely following the thought of Democritus, a pre-Socratic philosopher and one of the inventors of atomism. However, he modifies Democritus' atomism in at least three important ways.

i. Weight

The first is that Epicurus thinks that atoms have weight. Like Democritus, Epicurus believes that atoms have the properties of size, shape, and resistance. Democritus explains all atomic motion as the result of previous atomic collisions, plus the inertia of atoms. Aristotle, however, criticizes Democritus on this point, saying that Democritus has not explained why it is that atoms move at all, rather than simply standing still. Epicurus seems to be answering this criticism when he says that atoms do have a natural motion of direction--'downward'--even though there is no bottom to the universe. This natural motion is supposed to give an explanation for why atoms move in the first place. Also, Epicurus thinks that it is evident that bodies do tend to travel down, all else being equal, and he thinks that positing weight as an atomic property accounts for this better than thinking all atomic motion is the result of past collisions and inertia.

ii. The Swerve

The second modification of Democritus' views is the addition of the 'swerve.' In addition to the regular tendency of atoms to move downward, Epicurus thinks that occasionally, and at random times, the atoms swerve to the side. One reason for this swerve is that it is needed to explain why there are atomic collisions. The natural tendency of atoms is to fall straight downward, at uniform velocity. If this were the only natural atomic motion, the atoms never would have collided with one another, forming macroscopic bodies. As Lucretius puts it, they would 'fall downward, like drops of rain, through the deep void.' The second reason for thinking that atoms swerve is that a random atomic motion is needed to preserve human freedom and 'break the bonds of fate,' as Lucretius says. If the laws of atomic motion are deterministic, then the past positions of the atoms in the universe, plus these laws, determine everything that will occur, including human action. Cicero reports that Epicurus worries that, if it has been true from eternity that, e.g., "Milo will wrestle tomorrow," then presently deliberating about whether to make it true or false would be idle.

iii. Sensible Qualities

The third difference between Epicurus and Democritus has to do with their attitudes toward the reality of sensible properties. Democritus thinks that, in reality, only atoms and the void exist, and that sensible qualities such as sweetness, whiteness, and the like exist only 'by convention.' It is controversial exactly how to understand Democritus' position, but most likely he is asserting that atoms themselves have no sensible qualities--they are simply extended bits of stuff. The sensible qualities that we think bodies have, like sweetness, are not really in the object at all, but are simply subjective states of the percipient's awareness produced by the interaction of bodies with our sense-organs. This is shown, thinks Democritus, by the fact that the same body appears differently to different percipients depending on their bodily constitution, e.g., that a 'white' body appears yellow to somebody with jaundice, or that honey tastes bitter to an ill person. From this, Democritus derives skeptical conclusions. He is pessimistic about our ability to gain any knowledge about the world on the basis of our senses, since they systematically deceive us about the way the world is.

Epicurus wants to resist these pessimistic conclusions. He argues that properties like sweetness, whiteness, and such do not exist at the atomic level--individual atoms are not sweet or white--but that these properties are nonetheless real. These are properties of macroscopic bodies, but the possession of these properties by macroscopic bodies are explicable in terms of the properties of and relations amongst the individual atoms that make up bodies. Epicurus thinks that bodies have the capability to cause us to have certain types of experiences because of their atomic structure, and that such capabilities are real properties of the bodies. Similar considerations apply for properties like "being healthy," "being deadly," and "being enslaved." They are real, but can only apply to groups of atoms (like people), not individual atoms. And these sorts of properties are also relational properties, not intrinsic ones. For example, cyanide is deadly--not deadly per se, but deadly for human beings (and perhaps for other types of organisms). Nonetheless, its deadliness for us is still a real property of the cyanide, albeit a relational one.

d. Mechanistic Explanations of Natural Phenomena

One important aspect of Epicurus' philosophy is his desire to replace teleological (goal-based) explanations of natural phenomena with mechanistic ones. His main target is mythological explanations of meteorological occurrences and the like in terms of the will of the gods. Because Epicurus wishes to banish the fear of the gods, he insists that occurrences like earthquakes and lightning can be explained entirely in atomic terms and are not due to the will of the gods. Epicurus is also against the intrinsic teleology of philosophers like Aristotle. Teeth appear to be well-designed for the purpose of chewing. Aristotle thinks that this apparent purposiveness in nature cannot be eliminated, and that the functioning of the parts of organisms must be explained by appealing to how they contribute to the functioning of the organism as a whole. Other philosophers, such as the Stoics, took this apparent design as evidence for the intelligence and benevolence of God. Epicurus, however, following Empedocles, tries to explain away this apparent purposiveness in nature in a proto-Darwinian way, as the result of a process of natural selection.

e. The Gods

Because of its denial of divine providence, Epicureanism was often charged in antiquity with being a godless philosophy, although Epicurus and his followers denied the charge. The main upshot of Epicurean theology is certainly negative, however. Epicurus' mechanistic explanations of natural phenomena are supposed to displace explanations that appeal to the will of the gods. In addition, Epicurus is one of the earliest philosophers we know of to have raised the Problem of Evil, arguing against the notion that the world is under the providential care of a loving deity by pointing out the manifold suffering in the world.

Despite this, Epicurus says that there are gods, but these gods are quite different from the popular conception of gods. We have a conception of the gods, says Epicurus, as supremely blessed and happy beings. Troubling oneself about the miseries of the world, or trying to administer the world, would be inconsistent with a life of tranquility, says Epicurus, so the gods have no concern for us. In fact, they are unaware of our existence, and live eternally in the intermundia, the space between the cosmoi. For Epicurus, the gods function mainly as ethical ideals, whose lives we can strive to emulate, but whose wrath we need not fear.

Ancient critics thought the Epicurean gods were a thin smoke-screen to hide Epicurus' atheism, and difficulties with a literal interpretation of Epicurus' sayings on the nature of the gods (for instance, it appears inconsistent with Epicurus' atomic theory to hold that any compound body, even a god, could be immortal) have led some scholars to conjecture that Epicurus' 'gods' are thought-constructs, and exist only in human minds as idealizations, i.e., the gods exist, but only as projections of what the most blessed life would be.

f. Philosophy of Mind

Epicurus is one of the first philosophers to put forward an Identity Theory of Mind. In modern versions of the identity theory, the mind is identified with the brain, and mental processes are identified with neural processes. Epicurus' physiology is quite different; the mind is identified as an organ that resides in the chest, since the common Greek view was that the chest, not the head, is the seat of the emotions. However, the underlying idea is quite similar. (Note: not all commentators accept that Epicurus' theory is actually an Identity Theory.)

The main point that Epicurus wants to establish is that the mind is something bodily. The mind must be a body, thinks Epicurus, because of its ability to interact with the body. The mind is affected by the body, as vision, drunkenness, and disease show. Likewise, the mind affects the body, as our ability to move our limbs when we want to and the physiological effects of emotional states show. Only bodies can interact with other bodies, so the mind must be a body. Epicurus says that the mind cannot be something incorporeal, as Plato thinks, since the only thing that is not a body is void, which is simply empty space and cannot act or be acted upon.

The mind, then, is an organ in the body, and mental processes are identified with atomic processes. The mind is composed of four different types of particles--fire, air, wind, and the "nameless element," which surpasses the other particles in its fineness. Although Epicurus is reticent about the details, some features of the mind are accounted for in terms of the features of these atoms--for instance, the mind is able to be moved a great deal by the impact of an image (which is something quite flimsy), because of the smallness of the particles that make up the mind. The mind proper, which is primarily responsible for sensation and thought, is located in the chest, but Epicurus thinks that there is also a 'spirit,' spread throughout the rest of the body, which allows the mind to communicate with it. The mind and spirit play roles very similar to those of the central and peripheral nervous systems in modern theory.

One important result of Epicurus' philosophy of mind is that death is annihilation. The mind is able to engage in the motions of sensation and thought only when it is housed in the body and the atoms that make it up are properly arranged. Upon death, says Epicurus, the container of the body shatters, and the atoms disperse in the air. The atoms are eternal, but the mind made up of these atoms is not, just as other compound bodies cease to exist when the atoms that make them up disperse.

g. Perception

Epicurus explains perception in terms of the interaction of atoms with the sense-organs. Objects continually throw off one-atom-thick layers, like the skin peeling off of an onion. These images, or "eidola," fly through the air and bang into one's eyes, from which one learns about the properties of the objects that threw off these eidola. This explains vision. Other senses are analyzed in similar terms; e.g., the soothing action of smooth atoms on the tongue causes the sensation of sweetness. As noted above, Epicurus maintains that such sensible qualities are real qualities of bodies.

4. Epistemology

Epicurus' epistemology is resolutely empiricist and anti-skeptical. All of our knowledge ultimately comes from the senses, thinks Epicurus, and we can trust the senses, when properly used. Epicurus' epistemology was contained in his work the 'Canon,' or 'measuring stick,' which is lost, so many of the details of his views are unavailable to us. 4a. The Canon: sensations, preconceptions, and feelings

Epicurus says that there are three criteria of truth: sensations, 'preconceptions,' and feelings. Sensations give us information about the external world, and we can test the judgments based upon sensations against further sensations; e.g., a provisional judgment that a tower is round, based upon sensation, can be tested against later sensations to be corroborated or disproved. Epicurus says that all sensations give us information about the world, but that sensation itself is never in error, since sensation is a purely passive, mechanical reception of images and the like by sense-organs, and the senses themselves do not make judgments 'that' the world is this way or that. Instead, error enters in when we make judgments about the world based upon the information received through the senses.

Epicurus thinks that, in order to make judgments about the world, or even to start any inquiry whatsoever, we must already be in possession of certain basic concepts, which stand in need of no further proof or definition, on pain of entering into an infinite regress. This concern is similar to the Paradox of Inquiry explored by Plato in the Meno, that one must already know about something in order to be able to inquire about it. However, instead of postulating that our immaterial souls had acquaintance with transcendent Forms in a pre-natal existence, as Plato does, Epicurus thinks that we have certain 'preconceptions'--concepts such as 'body,' 'person,' 'usefulness,' and 'truth'--which are formed in our (material) minds as the result of repeated sense-experiences of similar objects. Further ideas are formed by processes of analogy or similarity or by compounding these basic concepts. Thus, all ideas are ultimately formed on the basis of sense-experience.

Feelings of pleasure and pain form the basic criteria for what is to be sought and avoided.

b. Anti-skeptical Arguments

Epicurus is concerned to refute the skeptical tendencies of Democritus, whose metaphysics and theory of perception were similar to Epicurus'. At least three separate anti-skeptical arguments are given by Epicureans:

i. The "Lazy Argument"

Epicurus says that it is impossible to live as a skeptic. If a person really were to believe that he knows nothing, then he would have no reason to engage in one course of action instead of another. Thus, the consistent skeptic would engage in no action whatsoever, and would die.

ii. The Self-refutation Argument

If a skeptic claims that nothing can be known, then one should ask whether he knows that nothing can be known. If he says 'yes,' then he is contradicting himself. If he doesn't say yes, then he isn't making a claim, and we don't need to listen to him.

iii. The Argument from Concept-formation

If the skeptic says that nothing can be known, or that we cannot know the truth, we can ask him where he gets his knowledge of concepts such as 'knowledge' and 'truth.' If the senses cannot be relied on, as the skeptic claims, then he is not entitled to use concepts such as 'knowledge' and 'truth' in formulating his thesis, since such concepts derive from the senses.

5. Ethics

Epicurus' ethics is a form of egoistic hedonism; i.e., he says that the only thing that is intrinsically valuable is one's own pleasure; anything else that has value is valuable merely as a means to securing pleasure for oneself. However, Epicurus has a sophisticated and idiosyncratic view of the nature of pleasure, which leads him to recommend a virtuous, moderately ascetic life as the best means to securing pleasure. This contrasts Epicurus strongly with the Cyrenaics, a group of ancient hedonists who better fit the stereotype of hedonists as recommending a policy of "eat, drink, and be merry."

a. Hedonism, Psychological and Ethical

Epicurus' ethics starts from the Aristotelian commonplace that the highest good is what is valued for its own sake, and not for the sake of anything else, and Epicurus agrees with Aristotle that happiness is the highest good. However, he disagrees with Aristotle by identifying happiness with pleasure. Epicurus gives two reasons for this. The main reason is that pleasure is the only thing that people do, as a matter of fact, value for its own sake; that is, Epicurus' ethical hedonism is based upon his psychological hedonism. Everything we do, claims Epicurus, we do for the sake ultimately of gaining pleasure for ourselves. This is supposedly confirmed by observing the behavior of infants, who, it is claimed, instinctively pursue pleasure and shun pain. This is also true of adults, thinks Epicurus, but in adults it is more difficult to see that this is true, since adults have much more complicated beliefs about what will bring them pleasure. But the Epicureans did spend a great deal of energy trying to make plausible the contention that all activity, even apparently self-sacrificing activity or activity done solely for the sake of virtue or what is noble, is in fact directed toward obtaining pleasure for oneself.

The second proof, which fits in well with Epicurus' empiricism, supposedly lies in one's introspective experience. One immediately perceives that pleasure is good and that pain is bad, in the same way that one immediately perceives that fire is hot; no further argument is needed to show the goodness of pleasure or the badness of pain. (Of course, this does not establish Epicurus' further contention that only pleasure is intrinsically valuable and only pain is intrinsically bad.)

Although all pleasures are good and all pains evil, Epicurus says that not all pleasures are choiceworthy or all pains to be avoided. Instead, one should calculate what is in one's long-term self-interest, and forgo what will bring pleasure in the short-term if doing so will ultimately lead to greater pleasure in the long-term.

b. Types of Pleasure

For Epicurus, pleasure is tied closely to satisfying one's desires. He distinguishes between two different types of pleasure: 'moving' pleasures and 'static' pleasures. 'Moving' pleasures occur when one is in the process of satisfying a desire, e.g., eating a hamburger when one is hungry. These pleasures involve an active titillation of the senses, and these feelings are what most people call 'pleasure.' However, Epicurus says that after one's desires have been satisfied, (e.g., when one is full after eating), the state of satiety, of no longer being in need or want, is itself pleasurable. Epicurus calls this a 'static' pleasure, and says that these static pleasures are the best pleasures.

Because of this, Epicurus denies that there is any intermediate state between pleasure and pain. When one has unfulfilled desires, this is painful, and when one no longer has unfulfilled desires, this steady state is the most pleasurable of all, not merely some intermediate state between pleasure and pain.

Epicurus also distinguishes between physical and mental pleasures and pains. Physical pleasures and pains concern only the present, whereas mental pleasures and pains also encompass the past (fond memories of past pleasure or regret over past pain or mistakes) and the future (confidence or fear about what will occur). The greatest destroyer of happiness, thinks Epicurus, is anxiety about the future, especially fear of the gods and fear of death. If one can banish fear about the future, and face the future with confidence that one's desires will be satisfied, then one will attain tranquility (ataraxia), the most exalted state. In fact, given Epicurus' conception of pleasure, it might be less misleading to call him a 'tranquillist' instead of a 'hedonist.'

c. Types of Desire

Because of the close connection of pleasure with desire-satisfaction, Epicurus devotes a considerable part of his ethics to analyzing different kinds of desires. If pleasure results from getting what you want (desire-satisfaction) and pain from not getting what you want (desire-frustration), then there are two strategies you can pursue with respect to any given desire: you can either strive to fulfill the desire, or you can try to eliminate the desire. For the most part Epicurus advocates the second strategy, that of paring your desires down to a minimum core, which are then easily satisfied.

Epicurus distinguishes between three types of desires: natural and necessary desires, natural but non-necessary desires, and "vain and empty" desires. Examples of natural and necessary desires include the desires for food, shelter, and the like. Epicurus thinks that these desires are easy to satisfy, difficult to eliminate (they are 'hard-wired' into human beings naturally), and bring great pleasure when satisfied. Furthermore, they are necessary for life, and they are naturally limited: that is, if one is hungry, it only takes a limited amount of food to fill the stomach, after which the desire is satisfied. Epicurus says that one should try to fulfill these desires.

Vain desires include desires for power, wealth, fame, and the like. They are difficult to satisfy, in part because they have no natural limit. If one desires wealth or power, no matter how much one gets, it is always possible to get more, and the more one gets, the more one wants. These desires are not natural to human beings, but inculcated by society and by false beliefs about what we need; e.g., believing that having power will bring us security from others. Epicurus thinks that these desires should be eliminated.

An example of a natural but non-necessary desire is the desire for luxury food. Although food is needed for survival, one does not need a particular type of food to survive. Thus, despite his hedonism, Epicurus advocates a surprisingly ascetic way of life. Although one shouldn't spurn extravagant foods if they happen to be available, becoming dependent on such goods ultimately leads to unhappiness. As Epicurus puts it, "If you wish to make Pythocles wealthy, don't give him more money; rather, reduce his desires." By eliminating the pain caused by unfulfilled desires, and the anxiety that occurs because of the fear that one's desires will not be fulfilled in the future, the wise Epicurean attains tranquility, and thus happiness.

d. The Virtues

Epicurus' hedonism was widely denounced in the ancient world as undermining traditional morality. Epicurus, however, insists that courage, moderation, and the other virtues are needed in order to attain happiness. However, the virtues for Epicurus are all purely instrumental goods--that is, they are valuable solely for the sake of the happiness that they can bring oneself, not for their own sake. Epicurus says that all of the virtues are ultimately forms of prudence, of calculating what is in one's own best interest. In this, Epicurus goes against the majority of Greek ethical theorists, such as the Stoics, who identify happiness with virtue, and Aristotle, who identifies happiness with a life of virtuous activity. Epicurus thinks that natural science and philosophy itself also are instrumental goods. Natural science is needed in order to give mechanistic explanations of natural phenomena and thus dispel the fear of the gods, while philosophy helps to show us the natural limits of our desires and to dispel the fear of death.

e. Justice

Epicurus is one of the first philosophers to give a well-developed contractarian theory of justice. Epicurus says that justice is an agreement "neither to harm nor be harmed," and that we have a preconception of justice as "what is useful in mutual associations." People enter into communities in order to gain protection from the dangers of the wild, and agreements concerning the behavior of the members of the community are needed in order for these communities to function, e.g., prohibitions of murder, regulations concerning the killing and eating of animals, and so on. Justice exists only where there are such agreements.

Like the virtues, justice is valued entirely on instrumental grounds, because of its utility for each of the members of society. Epicurus says that the main reason not to be unjust is that one will be punished if one gets caught, and that even if one does not get caught, the fear of being caught will still cause pain. However, he adds that the fear of punishment is needed mainly to keep fools in line, who otherwise would kill, steal, etc. The Epicurean wise man recognizes the usefulness of the laws, and since he does not desire great wealth, luxury goods, political power, or the like, he sees that he has no reason to engage in the conduct prohibited by the laws in any case.

Although justice only exists where there is an agreement about how to behave, that does not make justice entirely 'conventional,' if by 'conventional' we mean that any behavior dictated by the laws of a particular society is thereby just, and that the laws of a particular society are just for that society. Since the 'justice contract' is entered into for the purpose of securing what is useful for the members of the society, only laws that are actually useful are just. Thus, a prohibition of murder would be just, but antimiscegenation laws would not. Since what is useful can vary from place to place and time to time, what laws are just can likewise vary.

f. Friendship

Epicurus values friendship highly and praises it in quite extravagant terms. He says that friendship "dances around the world" telling us that we must "wake to blessedness." He also says that the wise man is sometimes willing to die for a friend. Because of this, some scholars have thought that in this area, at least, Epicurus abandons his egoistic hedonism and advocates altruism toward friends. This is not clear, however. Epicurus consistently maintains that friendship is valuable because it is one of the greatest means of attaining pleasure. Friends, he says, are able to provide one another the greatest security, whereas a life without friends is solitary and beset with perils. In order for there to be friendship, Epicurus says, there must be trust between friends, and friends have to treat each other as well as they treat themselves. The communities of Epicureans can be seen as embodying these ideals, and these are ideals that ultimately promote ataraxia.

g. Death

One of the greatest fears that Epicurus tries to combat is the fear of death. Epicurus thinks that this fear is often based upon anxiety about having an unpleasant afterlife; this anxiety, he thinks, should be dispelled once one realizes that death is annihilation, because the mind is a group of atoms that disperses upon death.

i. The No Subject of Harm Argument

If death is annihilation, says Epicurus, then it is 'nothing to us.' Epicurus' main argument for why death is not bad is contained in the Letter to Menoeceus and can be dubbed the 'no subject of harm' argument. If death is bad, for whom is it bad? Not for the living, since they're not dead, and not for the dead, since they don't exist. His argument can be set out as follows:

  1. Death is annihilation.
  2. The living have not yet been annihilated (otherwise they wouldn't be alive).
  3. Death does not affect the living. (from 1 and 2)
  4. So, death is not bad for the living. (from 3)
  5. For something to be bad for somebody, that person has to exist, at least.
  6. The dead do not exist. (from 1)
  7. Therefore, death is not bad for the dead. (from 5 and 6)
  8. Therefore death is bad for neither the living nor the dead. (from 4 and 7)

Epicurus adds that if death causes you no pain when you're dead, it's foolish to allow the fear of it to cause you pain now.

ii. The Symmetry Argument

A second Epicurean argument against the fear of death, the so-called 'symmetry argument,' is recorded by the Epicurean poet Lucretius. He says that anyone who fears death should consider the time before he was born. The past infinity of pre-natal non-existence is like the future infinity of post-mortem non-existence; it is as though nature has put up a mirror to let us see what our future non-existence will be like. But we do not consider not having existed for an eternity before our births to be a terrible thing; therefore, neither should we think not existing for an eternity after our deaths to be evil.

6. References and Further Reading

This is not meant as comprehensive bibliography; rather, it's a selection of further texts to read for those who want to learn more about Epicurus and Epicureanism. Most of the books listed below have extensive bibliographies for those looking for more specialized and scholarly publications.

a. Collections of Primary Source

  • The Epicurus Reader, translated and edited by Brad Inwood and L.P. Gerson, Hackett Publishing.
    • This inexpensive collection has most of the major extant writings of Epicurus, in addition to other ancient sources such as Cicero and Plutarch who wrote about Epicureanism. (Lucretius is not included much.) However, there is little commentary or explication of the material, and some of the primary sources are fairly opaque.
  • The Hellenistic philosophers, Volume 1: translations of the principal sources, with philosophical commentary, by A.A. Long and D.N. Sedley, Cambridge University Press.
    • This excellent book organizes the texts into sections topically, (e.g., "Atoms," "Soul," "Language," "Death,") and follows each selection of texts with commentary and explication. Vol. 2, which contains the original Greek and Latin texts, has a fine, if somewhat dated (1987) bibliography at the end.Lucretius, De Rerum Natura

There are many different editions of Lucretius' masterpiece, an extended exposition of Epicurus' metaphysics, philosophy of mind, and natural science. I personally like the translation by Rolfe Humphries: Lucretius: The Way Things Are. The De Rerum Natura of Titus Lucretius Carus, Indiana University Press. Humphries translates Lucretius' poem as a poem, not as prose, yet the translation is still very clear and readable.

b. Recent Books on Particular Areas of Epicurus' Philosophy

The books below are all well-written and influential. They deal in-depth with problems of interpreting particular areas of Epicurus' philosophy, while still remaining, for the most part, accessible to well-educated general readers. They also have extensive bibliographies. However, do not assume that the interpretations of Epicurus in these books are always widely accepted.

  • Hellenistic Philosophy of Mind, by Julia Annas, University of California Press.
    • This book deals with Epicurean and Stoic theories of what the mind is.
  • Epicurus' Ethical Theory : The Pleasures of Invulnerability, by Phillip Mitsis, Cornell University Press.
    • This book is concerned with all of the major areas of Epicurean ethics, from pleasure, to friendship, justice, and human freedom. Mitsis is especially good at showing how Epicurus' conception of pleasure differs from that of the utilitarians.
  • The Morality of Happiness, by Julia Annas, Oxford University Press.
    • This book focuses deals with all major ancient theorists from Aristotle on, but is still a good source of information on Epicurean ethics, especially if one wants to put Epicurean ethics in the context of other ancient ethical theories.
  • Epicurus' Scientific Method, by Elizabeth Asmis, Cornell University Press.
    • The best book-length treatment of Epicurus' epistemology available. A little more technical than the books above, but still fairly accessible.

Author Information

Tim O'Keefe
Email: see web page
Georgia State University
U. S. A.


Gnosticism (after gnôsis, the Greek word for "knowledge" or "insight") is the name given to a loosely organized religious and philosophical movement that flourished in the first and second centuries CE. The exact origin(s) of this school of thought cannot be traced, although it is possible to locate influences or sources as far back as the second and first centuries BCE, such as the early treatises of the Corpus Hermeticum, the Jewish Apocalyptic writings, and especially Platonic philosophy and the Hebrew Scriptures themselves.

In spite of the diverse nature of the various Gnostic sects and teachers, certain fundamental elements serve to bind these groups together under the loose heading of "Gnosticism" or "Gnosis." Chief among these elements is a certain manner of "anti-cosmic world rejection" that has often been mistaken for mere dualism. According to the Gnostics, this world, the material cosmos, is the result of a primordial error on the part of a supra-cosmic, supremely divine being, usually called Sophia (Wisdom) or simply the Logos. This being is described as the final emanation of a divine hierarchy, called the Plêrôma or "Fullness," at the head of which resides the supreme God, the One beyond Being. The error of Sophia, which is usually identified as a reckless desire to know the transcendent God, leads to the hypostatization of her desire in the form of a semi-divine and essentially ignorant creature known as the Demiurge (Greek: dêmiourgos, "craftsman"), or Ialdabaoth, who is responsible for the formation of the material cosmos. This act of craftsmanship is actually an imitation of the realm of the Pleroma, but the Demiurge is ignorant of this, and hubristically declares himself the only existing God. At this point, the Gnostic revisionary critique of the Hebrew Scriptures begins, as well as the general rejection of this world as a product of error and ignorance, and the positing of a higher world, to which the human soul will eventually return. However, when all is said and done, one finds that the error of Sophia and the begetting of the inferior cosmos are occurrences that follow a certain law of necessity, and that the so-called "dualism" of the divine and the earthly is really a reflection and expression of the defining tension that constitutes the being of humanity---the human being.

Table of Contents

  1. The Philosophical Character of Gnosticism
    1. Psychology
    2. Existentialism
    3. Hermeneutics
      1. Reception and Revelation
  2. The Gnostic Mytho-Logos
    1. The Myth of Sophia
    2. Christian Gnosticism
      1. Basilides
      2. Marcion
      3. Valentinus and the Valentinian School
        1. The System of Ptolemy
    3. Mani and Manichaeism
  3. Platonism and Gnosticism
    1. Numenius of Apamea and Neo-Platonism
  4. Concluding Summary
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. Sources
    2. Suggestions for Further Reading

1. The Philosophical Character of Gnosticism

Gnosticism, as an intellectual product, is grounded firmly in the general human act of reflecting upon existence. The Gnostics were concerned with the basic questions of existence or "being-in-the-world" (Dasein)—that is: who we are (as human beings), where we have come from, and where we are heading, historically and spiritually (cf. Hans Jonas, The Gnostic Religion 1958, p. 334). These questions lie at the very root of philosophical thinking; but the answers provided by the Gnostics go beyond philosophical speculation toward the realm of religious doctrine and mysticism. However, it is impossible to understand fully the meaning of Gnosticism without beginning at the philosophical level, and orienting oneself accordingly. Since any orientation toward an ancient phenomenon must always proceed by way of contemporary ideas and habits of mind, an interpretative discussion of Gnostic thinking as it applies to Psychology, Existentialism, and Hermeneutics, is not amiss here. Once we have understood, to the extent of our ability, the philosophical import of Gnostic ideas, and how they relate to contemporary philosophical issues, then we may enter into the historical milieu of the Gnostics with some degree of confidence—a confidence devoid, to the extent that this is possible, of tainting exegetical presuppositions.

a. Psychology

Who are we? The answer to this question involves an account (logos) of the nature of the soul (psukhê or psyche); and the attempt to provide an answer has accordingly been dubbed the science or practice of "psychology"—an account of the soul or mind (psukhê, in ancient Greek, denoted both soul, as the principle of life, and mind, as the principle of intellect). Carl Jung, drawing upon Gnostic mythical schemas, identified the objectively oriented consciousness with the material or "fleshly" part of humankind—that is, with the part of the human being that is, according to the Gnostics, bound up in the cosmic cycle of generation and decay, and subject to the bonds of fate and time (cf. Apocryphon of John [Codex II] 28:30). The human being who identifies him/herself with the objectively existing world comes to construct a personality, a sense of self, that is, at base, fully dependent upon the ever-changing structures of temporal existence. The resulting lack of any sense of of permanence, of autonomy, leads such an individual to experience anxieties of all kinds, and eventually to shun the mysterious and collectively meaningful patterns of human existence in favor of a private and stifling subjective context, in the confines of which life plays itself out in the absence of any reference to a greater plan or scheme. Hopelessness, atheism, despair, are the results of such an existence. This is not the natural end of the human being, though; for, according to Jung (and the Gnostics) the temporally constructed self is not the true self. The true self is the supreme consciousness existing and persisting beyond all space and time. Jung calls this the pure consciousness or Self, in contradistinction to the "ego consciousness" which is the temporally constructed and maintained form of a discrete existent (cf. C.G. Jung, "Gnostic Symbols of the Self," in The Gnostic Jung 1992, pp. 55-92). This latter form of "worldly" consciousness the Gnostics identified with soul (psukhê), while the pure or true Self they identified with spirit (pneuma)—that is, mind relieved of its temporal contacts and context. This distinction had an important career in Gnostic thought, and was adopted by St. Paul, most notably in his doctrine of the spiritual resurrection (1 Corinthians 15:44). The psychological or empirical basis of this view, which soon turns into a metaphysical or onto-theological attitude, is the recognized inability of the human mind to achieve its grandest designs while remaining subject to the rigid law and order of a disinterested and aloof cosmos. The spirit-soul distinction (which of course translates into, or perhaps presupposes, the more fundamental mind-body distinction) marks the beginning of a transcendentalist and soteriological attitude toward the cosmos and temporal existence in general.

b. Existentialism

The basic experience of existence, described by the philosophy that has become known as "Existentialism," involves a general feeling of loneliness or abandonment (Geworfenheit, "having been thrown") in/to a world that is not amenable to the primordial desires of the human being (cf. Jonas, p. 336). The recognition that the first or primal desire of the human being is for the actualization or positing of a concrete self or "I" (an autonomous and discrete individual existing and persisting amidst the flux and flow of temporal and external "reality") leads to the disturbing realization that this world is not akin to the human being; for this world (so it seems) follows it own course, a course already mapped out and set in motion long before the advent of human consciousness. Furthermore, that the essential activity of the human being—that is, to actualize an autonomous self within the world—is carried out in opposition to a power or "will" (the force of nature) that always seems to thwart or subvert this supremely human endeavor, leads to the acknowledgment of an anti-human and therefore anti-intellectual power; and this power, since it seems to act, must also exist. However, the fact that its act does not manifest itself as a communication between humanity and nature (or pure objectivity), but rather as a mechanical process of blind necessity occurring apart from the human endeavor, places the human being in a superior position. For even though the force of nature may arbitrarily wipe out an individual human existent, just as easily as it brings one into existence, this natural force is not conscious of its activity. The human mind, on the other hand, is. And so a gap or fissure—a product of reflection—is set up, by which the human being may come to orient him/herself with and toward the world in which s/he exists and persists, for a brief moment. Martin Heidegger has described this brief moment of orientation with/in (toward) the world as "care" (Sorge), which is always a care or concern for the "moment" (Augenblick) within which all existence occurs; this "care" is understood as the product of humankind's recognition of their unavoidable being-toward-death. But this orientation is never completed, since the human soul finds that it cannot achieve its purpose or complete actualization within the confines set by nature.

While the thwarting necessity of nature is, for the Existentialist, a simple, unquestioned fact; for the Gnostics it is the result of the malignant designs of an inferior god, the Demiurge, carried out through and by this ignorant deity's own law. In other words, nature is, for modern Existentialism, merely indifferent, while for the Gnostics it was actively hostile toward the human endeavor. "[C]osmic law, once worshipped as the expression of a reason with which man's reason can communicate in the act of cognition, is now seen only in its aspect of compulsion which thwarts man's freedom" (Jonas, p. 328). Time and history come to be understood as the provenance of the human mind, over-against futile idealistic constructions like law and order, nomos and cosmos. Knowledge, at this point, becomes a concrete endeavor—a self-salvific task for the human race.

Becoming aware of itself, the self also discovers that it is not really its own, but is rather the involuntary executor of cosmic designs. Knowledge, gnosis, may liberate man from this servitude; but since the cosmos is contrary to life and to spirit, the saving knowledge cannot aim at integration into the cosmic whole and at compliance with its laws. For the Gnostics ... man's alienation from the world is to be deepened and brought to a head, for the extrication of the inner self which only thus can gain itself (Jonas, p. 329).

The obvious question, then—Where did we come from? -- only becomes intelligible alongside and within the more dynamic question of Where are we heading?

c. Hermeneutics

In the context of ancient Greek thinking, hermêneia was usually associated with tekhnê, giving us the tekhnê hermêneutikê or "art of interpretation" discussed by Aristotle in his treatise De Interpretatione [Peri Hermêneias]. Interpretation or hermeneutics, according to Aristotle, does not bring us to a direct knowledge of the meaning of things, but only to an understanding of how things come to appear before us, and thereby to provide us with an avenue toward empirical knowledge, as it were.

Moreover, discourse is hermêneia because a discursive statement is a grasp of the real by meaningful expression, not a selection of so-called impressions coming from the things themselves (Paul Ricoeur, The Conflict of Interpretations 1974, p. 4).

In this sense, we may say that the "art of interpretation" is a distinctly historical method of understanding or coming to terms with reality. In other words, since our "expression" is always an ex-position, a going-out from the given forms or patterns of reality toward a living use of these forms with/in Life, then we, as human beings persisting in a realm of becoming, are responsible, in the last analysis, not for any eternal truths or "things in themselves," but only for the forms these things take on within the context of a living and thinking existence. Knowledge or understanding, then, is not of immutable and eternal things in themselves, but rather of the process by which things—that is, ideas, objects, events, persons, etc.—become revealed within the existential or ontological process of coming-to-know. The attention to process and the emergence of meaning occurs on the most immediate experiential level of human existence, and therefore contains about it nothing of the metaphysical. However, the birth of metaphysics may be located within this primordial or phenomenal structure of basic "brute" experience; for it is the natural tendency of the human mind to order and arrange its data according to rational principles.

The question will inevitably arise, though, as to whence these rational principles derive: are they a derivative product of the phenomenal realm of experience? or are they somehow endemic to the human mind as such, and hence eternal? If we take the first question as an answer, we are led to phenomenology, which "discovers, in place of an idealist subject locked within [a] system of meanings, a living being which from all time has, as the horizon of all its intentions, a world, the world" (Ricoeur, p. 9). According to the general contemporary or "post-modern" formulation, such a "living being" is directed, intentionally, always and only toward a multiplicitous world or realm in which human activity itself becomes the sole object of knowledge, apart from any "transcendent" metaphysical ideals or schemas. For the Gnostics, on the other hand, who worked within and upon the latter question, giving it a positive, if somewhat mytho-poetical answer, rational principles, which seem to be culled from a mere contact with sensible reality, are held to be reminders of a unified existence that is an eternal possibility, open to anyone capable of transcending and, indeed, transgressing this realm of experience and process —that is, of history. This "transgression" consists in the act of balancing oneself with/in, and orienting oneself toward, history as an interplay of past and present, in which the individual is poised for a decision—either to succumb to the flux and flow of an essentially decentered cosmic existence, or to strive for a re-integration into a godhead that is only barely recollected, and more obscure than the immediate perceptions of reality.

i. Reception and Revelation

Where are we heading? This question is at the very heart of Gnostic exegesis, and indeed colors and directs all attempts at coming to terms, not only with the Hebrew Scriptures, which served as the main text of Gnostic interpretation, but with existence in general.

The standard hermeneutical approach, both in our own era, and in Late Hellenistic times, is the receptive approach—that is, an engagement with texts of the past governed by the belief, on the part of the interpreter, that these texts have something to teach us. Whether we struggle to overcome our own "prejudices" or presuppositions, which are the inevitable result of our belonging to a particular tradition by way of the hermeneutical act (Gadamer), or allow our prejudices to shape our reading of a text, in an act of "creative misprision" (Bloom) we are still acknowledging, in some way, our debt to or dependence upon the text with which we are engaged. The Gnostics, in their reading of Scripture, acknowledged no such debt; for they believed that the Hebrew Bible was the written revelation of an inferior creator god (dêmiourgos), filled with lies intended to cloud the minds and judgment of the spiritual human beings (pneumatikoi) whom this Demiurge was intent on enslaving in his material cosmos.

Indeed, while the receptive hermeneutical method implies that we have something to learn from a text, the method employed by the Gnostics, which we may call the "revelatory" method, was founded upon the idea that they (the Gnostics) had received a supra-cosmic revelation, either in the form of a "call," or a vision, or even, perhaps, through the exercise of philosophical dialectic. This "revelation" was the knowledge (gnôsis) that humankind is alien to this realm, and possesses a "home on high" within the plêrôma, the "Fullness," where all the rational desires of the human mind come to full and perfect fruition. On this belief, all knowledge belonged to these Gnostics, and any interpretation of the biblical text would be for the purpose of explaining the true nature of things by elucidating the errors and distortions of the Demiurge. This approach treated the past as something already overcome yet still "present," insofar as certain members of the human race were still laboring under the old law—that is, were still reading the Scriptures in the receptive manner. The Gnostic, insofar as he still remained within the world, as an existing being, was, on the other hand, both present and future. That is to say, the Gnostic embodied within himself the salvific dynamism of a history that had broken from the constraint of a tyrannical past, and found the freedom to invent itself anew. The Gnostic understood himself to be at once at the center and at the end or culmination of this history, and this idea or ideal was reflected most powerfully in ancient Gnostic exegesis. We must now turn to a discussion of the concrete results of this hermeneutical method.

2. The Gnostic Mytho-Logos

The Gnostic Idea or Notion was not informed by a philosophical world-view or procedure. Rather, the Gnostic vision of the world was based upon the intuition of a radical and seemingly irreparable rupture between the realm of experience (pathos) and the realm of true Being---that is, existence in its positive, creative, or authentic aspect.

The problem faced by the Gnostics was how to explain such a radical, pre-philosophical intuition. This intuition is "pre-philosophical" because the brute experience of existing in a world that is alien to humankind's aspirations may submit itself to a variety of interpretations. And the attempt at an interpretation may take on the form of either muthos or logos---either a merely descriptive rendering of the experience, or a rationally ordered account of such an experience, including an explanation of its origins. The ancient Greek explanation of this experience was to call it a primal "awe" or "wonder" felt by the human being as he faces the world that stands so radically apart from him, and to posit this experience as the beginning of philosophy (cf. Aristotle, Metaphysics 982b 10-25 and Plato, Theaetetus 155d). But the Gnostics recognized this "awe" as the product of a radical disruption of the harmony of a realm persisting beyond becoming—that is, beyond "becoming" in the sense of pathos, or "that which is undergone." The muthos always corresponds to the "first-hand" account rendered by one who has undergone, immediately, the effect of a certain event. The myth is always an explanation of something already known, and therefore carries its truth-claim along with it, just as the immediacy of an event forbids any doubt or questioning on the part of the one undergoing it. The logos, on the other hand, is the product of a careful reflection (dianoia), and refers, for its truth-value, not to the immediate moment of "grasping" a phenomenon (prolêpsis), but to the moment of reflection during which one attains a conceptual knowledge of the phenomenon, and first comes to "know" it as such—this is gnôsis: insight. The direct result of this gnôsis is the emergence from the sense of existence as pathos, to the actuality of being as aisthêsis—that is, reception and judgment of experience by way of purely rational or divine criteria. Such criteria proceeds directly from the logos, or divine "ordering principle," to which the Gnostics believed themselves to be related, by way of a divine genealogy. Although Gnostic onto-theology proceeds by way of an elaborate myth, it is a myth informed always by the logos, and is, in this sense, a true mythology---that is, a rendering, in the immediacy of language, of that which is ever-present (to the Gnostic) as a product of privileged reflection.

a. The Myth of Sophia

According to Gnostic mythology (in general) We, humanity, are existing in this realm because a member of the transcendent godhead, Sophia (Wisdom), desired to actualize her innate potential for creativity without the approval of her partner or divine consort. Her hubris, in this regard, stood forth as raw materiality, and her desire, which was for the mysterious ineffable Father, manifested itself as Ialdabaoth, the Demiurge, that renegade principle of generation and corruption which, by its unalterable necessity, brings all beings to life, for a brief moment, and then to death for eternity. However, since even the Pleroma itself is not, according to the Gnostics, exempt from desire or passion, there must come into play a salvific event or savior—that is, Christ, the Logos, the "messenger," etc.—who descends to the material realm for the purpose of negating all passion, and raising the innocent human "sparks" (which fell from Sophia) back up to the Pleroma (cf. Apocryphon of John [Codex II] 9:25-25:14 ff.).

This process of re-integration with/in the godhead is one of the basic features of the Gnostic myth. The purpose of this re-integration (implicitly) is to establish a series of existents that are ontologically posterior to Sophia, and are the concrete embodiment of her "disruptive" desire—within the unified arena of the Pleroma. Indeed, if the Pleroma is really the Fullness, containing all things, it must contain the manifold principles of Wisdom's longing. In this sense, we must not view Gnostic salvation as a simply one-sided affair. The divine "sparks" that fell from Sophia, during her "passion," are un-integrated aspects of the godhead. We may say, then, that in the Hegelian sense the Gnostic Supreme God is seeking, eternally, His own actualization by way of full self-consciousness (cf. G.W.F. Hegel, History of Philosophy vol. 2, pp. 396-399).

But it is not really this simple. The Supreme God of the Gnostics effortlessly generates the Pleroma, and yet (or for this very reason!) this Pleroma comes to act independently of the Father. This is because all members of the Pleroma (known as Aeons) are themselves "roots and springs and fathers" (Tripartite Tractate 68:10) carrying Time within themselves, as a condition of their Being. When the disruption, brought about by the desire of Sophia, disturbed the Pleroma, this was not understood as a disturbance of an already established unity, but rather as the disturbance of an insupportable stasis that had come to be observed as divine. Indeed, when the Greeks first looked to the sky and admired the regularity of the rotations of the stars and planets, what they were admiring, according to the Gnostics, was not the image of divinity, but the image or representation of a "divine" stagnancy, a law and order that stifled freedom, which is the root of desire (cf. Jonas, pp. 260-261). The passion of Sophia—her production of the Demiurge, his enslavement of the human "sparks" in the material cosmos, and the subsequent redemption and restoration—are but one episode in the infinite, unfolding drama of spiritual existence. We, as human beings, just happen to be the unwitting victims of this particular drama. But if, as the Gnostics hold, our salvation consists in our becoming gods (Poimandres 26) or "lord[s] over creation and all corruption" (Valentinus, Fragment F, Layton) then how are we to be confident that, in ages to come, one of us will not give birth to another damned cosmos, just as Sophia had done?

b. Christian Gnosticism

The Christian idea that God has sent his only "Son" (the Logos) to suffer and die for the sins of all humankind, and so make possible the salvation of all, had a deep impact on Gnostic thought. In the extensive and important collection of Gnostic writings discovered at Nag Hammadi, Egypt in 1945, only a handful present the possibility of having originated in a pre-Christian, mostly Hellenistic Jewish milieu. The majority of these texts are Christian Gnostic writings from the early second to late third centuries CE, and perhaps a bit later. When we consider the notion of salvation and its meaning for the early Gnostics, who stressed the creative aspect of our post-salvific existence, we are struck by the bold assertion that our need for salvation arose, in the first place, from an error committed by a divine being, Sophia (Wisdom), during the course of her own creative act (cf. Apocryphon of John [Codex II] 9:25-10:6). Since this is the case, how, we are led to ask, will our post-salvation existence be any less prone to error or ignorance, even evil? The radical message of early Christianity provided the answer to this problematical question; and so the Gnostics took up the Christian idea and transformed it, by the power of their singular mytho-logical technique, into a philosophically and theologically complex speculative schema.

i. Basilides

The Christian philosopher Basilides of Alexandria (fl. 132-135 CE) developed a cosmology and cosmogony quite distinct from the Sophia myth of classical Gnosticism, and also reinterpreted key Christian concepts by way of the popular Stoic philosophy of the era. Basilides began his system with a "primal octet" consisting of the "unengendered parent" or Father; Intellect (nous); the "ordering principle" or "Word" (logos); "prudence" (phronêsis); Wisdom (sophia); Power (dunamis) (Irenaeus, Against Heresies 1.24.3, in Layton, The Gnostic Scriptures 1987) and "justice" and "peace" (Basilides, Fragment A, Layton). Through the union of Wisdom and Power, a group of angelic rulers came into existence, and from these rulers a total of 365 heavens or aeons were generated (Irenaeus 1.24.3). Each heaven had its own chief ruler (arkhôn), and numerous lesser angels. The final heaven, which Basilides claimed is the realm of matter in which we all dwell, was said by him to be ruled by "the god of the Jews," who favored the Jewish nation over all others, and so caused all manner of strife for the nations that came into contact with them—as well as for the Jewish people themselves. This behavior caused the rulers of the other 364 heavens to oppose the god of the Jews, and to send a savior, Jesus Christ, from the highest realm of the Father, to rescue the human beings who are struggling under the yoke of this jealous god (Irenaeus 1.24.4). Since the realm of matter is the sole provenance of this spiteful god, Basilides finds nothing of value in it, and states that "[s]alvation belongs only to the soul; the body is by nature corruptible" (Irenaeus 1.24.5). He even goes so far as to declare, contra Christian orthodoxy, that Christ's death on the cross was only apparent, and did not actually occur "in the flesh" (Irenaeus 1.24.4)—this doctrine came to be called docetism.

The notion that material existence is the product of a jealous and corrupt creator god, who favors one race over all others, is really the "mythical" expression of a deeply rooted ethical belief that the source of all evil is material or bodily existence. Indeed, Basilides goes so far as to assert that sin is the direct outcome of bodily existence, and that human suffering is the punishment either for actual sins committed, or even just for the general inclination to sin, which arises from the bodily impulses (cf. Fragments F and G). In an adaptation of Stoic ethical categories, Basilides declares that faith (pistis) "is not the rational assent of a soul possessing free will" (Fragment C); rather, faith is the natural mode of existence, and consequently, anyone living in accordance with the "law of nature" (pronoia), which Basilides calls the "kingdom," will remain free from the bodily impulses, and exist in a state of "salvation" (Fragment C). However, Basilides goes beyond simple Stoic doctrine in his belief that the "elect," that is, those who exist by faith, "are alien to the world, as if they were transcendent by nature" (Fragment E); for unlike the Stoics, who believed in a single, material cosmos, Basilides held the view, as we have seen, that the cosmos is composed of numerous heavens, with the material realm as the final heaven, and consequently corrupt. Since this final heaven represents the "last gasp" of divine emanation, as it were, and is by no means a perfect image of true divinity, adherence to its laws can lead to no good. Further, since the body is the means by which the ruler of this material cosmos enforces his law, freedom can only be attained by abandoning or "becoming indifferent to" all bodily impulses and desires. This indifference (adiaphoria) to bodily impulses, however, does not lead to a simple stagnant asceticism. Basilides does not call upon his hearers to abandon the material realm only to dissolve into negativity; instead, he offers them a new life, by appealing to the grand hierarchy of rulers persisting above the material realm (cf. Fragment D). When one turns to the greater hierarchy of Being, there results a "creation of good things" (Fragment C, translation modified). Love and personal creation—the begetting of the Good—are the final result of Basilides' vaguely dialectical system, and for this reason it is one of the most important early expressions of a truly Christian, if not "orthodox," philosophy.

ii. Marcion

Marcion of Sinope, in Pontus, was a contemporary of Basilides. According to Tertullian, he started his career as an orthodox Christian—whatever that meant at such an early stage of development of Christian doctrine—but soon formulated the remarkable and radical doctrine that was to lead to his excommunication from the Roman Church in July 144 CE, the traditional date of the founding of the Marcionite Church (Tertullian, Against Marcion 1.1; cf. Kurt Rudolph, Gnosis 1984, p. 314). The teaching of Marcion is elegantly simple: "the God proclaimed by the law and the prophets is not the Father of Our Lord Jesus Christ. The God (of the Old Testament) is known, but the latter (the Father of Jesus Christ) is unknown. The one is just, but the other is good" (Irenaeus 1.27.1). Marcion believed that this cosmos in which we live bears witness to the existence of an inflexible, legalistic, and sometimes spiteful and vengeful God. This view arose from a quite literal reading of the Old Testament, which does contain several passages describing God in terms not quite conducive to divinity—or at least to the idea of the divine that was current in the Hellenistic era. Marcion then, following Paul (in Romans 1:20) declared that God is knowable through His creation; however, unlike Paul, Marcion did not take this "natural revelation" as evidence of God's singularity and goodness. Quite the contrary, Marcion believed that he knew the God of this realm all too well, and that He was not worthy of the devotion and obedience that He demanded. Therefore, Marcion rejected the teaching of the orthodox Christian Church of his era, that Yahweh (or Jehovah) is the Father of Christ, and, through a creative excision of what he termed "Judaistic interpolations" in Luke and ten Pauline Epistles, Marcion simultaneously put forth his notion of the "alien God" and His act of salvation, and established the first Canon of Scripture used in a "Christian" Church (Jonas, pp. 145-146).

Marcion was not a philosopher in the sense that term has come to imply. He never developed, as far as we can tell from the surviving evidence, a systematic metaphysical, cosmological, or anthropological theory in the manner of a Basilides or a Valentinus (whom we shall discuss below), nor did he appeal to history as a witness for his doctrines. This latter point is the most important. Unlike the majority of Gnostics, who elaborated some sort of divine genealogy (e.g., the Sophia myth) to account for the presence of corruption and strife in the world, Marcion simply posited two opposed and irreducible Gods: the biblical god, and the unknown or "alien" God, who is the Father of Christ. According to Marcion, the god who controls this realm is a being who is intent on preserving his autonomy and power even at the expense of the (human) beings whom he created. The "alien" God, who is the Supremely Good, is a "god of injection," for he enters this realm from outside, in order to gratuitously adopt the pitiful human beings who remain under the sway of the inferior god as His own children. This act is the origin of and reason for the Incarnation of Christ, according to Marcion.

In spite of the absence of any solid philosophical or theological foundation for this rather simple formulation, Marcion's idea nevertheless expresses, in a somewhat crude and immediate form, a basic truth of human existence: that the desires of the Mind are incommensurable with the nature of material existence (cf. Irenaeus 1.27.2-3). Yet, if we follow Marcion's argument to its logical (or perhaps "anti-logical") conclusion, we discover an existential expression (not a philosophy) of the primal feeling of "abandonment" (Geworfenheit). This expression plays upon the subtle yet poignant opposition of "love of wisdom" (philosophia) and "complete wisdom" (plêrosophia). We are alone in a world that does not lend itself to our quest for unalterable truth, and so we befriend wisdom, which is the way of or manner in which we attain this intuited truth. According to Marcion, this truth is not to be found in this world—all that is to be found is the desire for this truth, which arises amongst human beings. However, since this desire, on the part of human beings, only produces various philosophies, none of which can hold claim to the absolute truth, Marcion concludes that the noetic beings (humans) of this realm are capable of nothing more than a shadow of wisdom. It is only by way of the guidance and grace of an alien and purely good God that humankind will rise to the level of plêrosophia or complete wisdom (cf. Colossians 2:2 ff.). Moreover, instead of attempting to discover the historical connection between the revelation of Christ and the teachings of the Old Testament, Marcion simply rejected the latter in favor of the former, on the belief that only the Gospel (thoughtfully edited by Marcion himself) points us toward complete wisdom (Irenaeus 1.27.2-3; Tertullian, Against Marcion 4.3).

While other Christian thinkers of the era were busy allegorizing the Old Testament in order to bring it into line with New Testament teaching, Marcion allowed the New Testament (albeit in his own special version) to speak to him as a singular voice of authority—and he formulated his doctrine accordingly. This doctrine emphasized not only humankind's radical alienation from the realm of their birth, but also their lack of any genealogical relation to the God who sacrificed His own Son to save them—in other words, Marcion painted a picture of humanity as a race displaced, with no true home at all (cf. Giovanni Filoramo, A History of Gnosticism 1992, p. 164). The hope of searching for a lost home, or of returning to a home from which one has been turned out, was absent in the doctrine of Marcion. Like Pico della Mirandola, Marcion declared the nature of humankind to be that of an eternally intermediate entity, poised precariously between heaven and earth (cp. Pico della Mirandola, Oration on the Dignity of Man, 3). However, unlike Pico, Marcion called for a radical displacement of humankind—a "rupture"—in which humanity would awaken to its full (if not innate) possibilities.

iii. Valentinus and the Valentinian School

The great Christian teacher and philosopher Valentinus (ca. 100-175 CE) spent his formative years in Alexandria, where he probably came into contact with Basilides. Valentinus later went to Rome, where he began his public teaching career, which was so successful that he actually had a serious chance of being elected Bishop of Rome. He lost the election, however, and with it Gnosticism lost the chance of becoming synonymous with Christianity, and hence a world religion. This is not to say that Valentinus failed to influence the development of Christian theology—he most certainly did, as we shall see below. It was through Valentinus, perhaps more than any other Christian thinker of his time, that Platonic philosophy, rhetorical elegance, and a deep, interpretive knowledge of scripture became introduced together into the realm of Christian theology. The achievement of Valentinus remained unmatched for nearly a century, until the incomparable Origen came on the scene. Yet even then, it may not be amiss to suggest that Origen never would have "happened" had it not been for the example of Valentinus.

The cosmology of Valentinus began, not with a unity, but with a primal duality, a dyad, composed of two entities called "the Ineffable" and "Silence." From these initial beings a second dyad of "Parent" and "Truth" was generated. These beings finally engendered a quaternity of "Word" (logos), "Life" (zôê), "Human Being" (anthropos), and "Church" (ekklêsia). Valentinus refers to this divine collectivity as the "first octet" (Irenaeus 1.11.1). This octet produced several other beings, one of which revolted or "turned away," as Irenaeus tells us, and set in motion the divine drama that would eventually produce the cosmos. According to Irenaeus, who was writing only about five years after the death of Valentinus, and in whose treatise Against Heresies the outline of Valentinus' cosmology is preserved, the entity responsible for initiating the drama is referred to simply as "the mother," by which is probably meant Sophia (Wisdom). From this "mother" both matter (hulê) and the savior, Christ, were generated. The realm of matter is described as a "shadow," produced from the "mother," and from which Christ distanced himself and "hastened up into the fullness" (Irenaeus 1.11.1; cp. Poimandres 5). At this point the "mother" produced another "child," the "craftsman" (dêmiourgos) responsible for the creation of the cosmos. In the account preserved by Irenaeus, we are told nothing of any cosmic drama in which "divine sparks" are trapped in fleshly bodies through the designs of the Demiurge. However, it is to be assumed that Valentinus did expound an anthropology similar to that of the classical Sophia myth (as represented, for example, in the Apocryphon of John; cf. also The Hypostasis of the Archons, and the Apocalypse of Adam), especially since his school, as represented most significantly by his star pupil Ptolemy (see below), came to develop a highly complex anthropological myth that must have grown out of a simpler model provided by Valentinus himself. The account preserved in Irenaeus ends with a description of a somewhat confused doctrine of a heavenly and an earthly Christ, and a brief passage on the role of the Holy Spirit (Irenaeus 1.11.1). From this one gets the idea that Valentinus was flirting with a primitive doctrine of the Trinity. Indeed, according to the fourth century theologian Marcellus of Ancyra, Valentinus was "the first to devise the notion of three subsistent entities (hypostases), in a work that he entitled On the Three Natures" (Valentinus, Fragment B, Layton).

Valentinus was certainly the most overtly Christian of the Gnostic philosophers of his era. We have seen how the thought of Basilides was pervaded by a Stoicizing tendency, and how Marcion felt the need to go beyond scripture to posit an "alien" redeemer God. Valentinus, on the other hand, seems to have been informed, in his speculations, primarily by Jewish and Christian scripture and exegesis, and only secondarily by "pagan" philosophy, particularly Platonism. This is most pronounced in his particular version of the familiar theological notion of "election" or "pre-destination," in which it is declared (following Paul in Romans 8:29) that God chose certain individuals, before the beginning of time, for salvation. Valentinus writes, in what is probably a remnant of a sermon:

From the beginning you [the "elect" or Gnostic Christians] have been immortal, and you are children of eternal life. And you wanted death to be allocated to yourselves so that you might spend it and use it up, and that death might die in you and through you. For when you nullify the world and are not yourselves annihilated, you are lord over creation and all corruption (Valentinus, Fragment F).

This seems to be Valentinus' response to the dilemma of the permanence of salvation: since Sophia or the divine "mother," a member of the Pleroma, had fallen into error, how can we be sure that we will not make the same or a similar mistake after we have reached the fullness? By declaring that it is the role and task of the "elect" or Gnostic Christian to use up death and nullify the world, Valentinus is making clear his position that these elite souls are fellow saviors of the world, along with Jesus, who was the first to take on the sin and corruption inherent in the material realm (cf. Irenaeus 1.11.1; and Layton p. 240). Therefore, since "the wages of sin is death" (Romans 6:23), any being who is capable of destroying death must be incapable of sin. For Valentinus, then, the individual who is predestined for salvation is also predestined for a sort of divine stewardship that involves an active hand in history, and not a mere repose with God, or even a blissful existence of loving creation, as Basilides held. Like Paul, Valentinus demanded that his hearers recognize their createdness. However, unlike Paul, they recognized their creator as the "Ineffable Parent," and not as the God of the Hebrew Scriptures. The task of Christian hermeneutics after Valentinus was to prove the continuity of the Old and New Testament. In this regard, as well as in the general spirituality of his teaching—not to mention his primitive trinitarian doctrine—Valentinus had an incalculable impact on the development of Christianity.

1) The System of Ptolemy

Ptolemy (or Ptolemaeus, fl. 140 CE) was described by St. Irenaeus as "the blossom of Valentinus' school" (Layton, p. 276). We know next to nothing about his life, except the two writings that have come down to us: the elaborate Valentinian philosophical myth preserved in Irenaeus, and Ptolemy's Epistle to Flora, preserved verbatim by St. Epiphanius. In the former we are met with a grand elaboration, by Ptolemy, of Valentinus' own system, which contains a complex anthropological myth centering around the passion of Sophia. We also find, in both the myth and the Epistle, Ptolemy making an attempt to bring Hebrew Scripture into line with Gnostic teaching and New Testament allegorization in a manner heretofore unprecedented among the Gnostics.

In the system of Ptolemy we are explicitly told that the cause of Sophia's fall was her desire to know the ineffable Father. Since the purpose of the Father's generating of the Aeons (of which Sophia was the last) was to "elevate all of them into thought" (Irenaeus 1.2.1) it was not permitted for any Aeon to attain a full knowledge of the Father. The purpose of the Pleroma was to exist as a living, collective expression of the intellectual magnitude of the Father, and if any single being within the Pleroma were to attain to the Father, all life would cease. This idea is based on an essentially positive attitude toward existence—that is, existence understood in the sense of striving, not for a reposeful end, but for an ever-increasing degree of creative or "constitutive" insight. The goal, on this view, is to produce through wisdom, and not simply to attain wisdom as an object or end in itself. Such an existence is not characterized by desire for an object, but rather by desire for the ability to persist in creative, constitutive engagement with/in one's own "circumstance" (circumscribed stance or individual arena). When Sophia desired to know the Father, then, what she was desiring was her own dissolution in favor of an envelopment in that which made her existence possible in the first place. This amounted to a rejection of the gift of the Father—that is, of the gift of individual existence and life. It is for this reason that Sophia was not permitted to know the Father, but was turned back by the "boundary" (horos) that separates the Pleroma from the "ineffable magnitude" of the Father (Irenaeus 1.2.2).

The remainder of Ptolemy's account is concerned with the production of the material cosmos out of the hypostatized "passions" of Sophia, and the activity of the Savior (Jesus Christ) in arranging these initially chaotic passions into a structured hierarchy of existents (Irenaeus 1.4.5 ff., and cp. Colossians 1:16). Three classes of human beings come into existence through this arrangement: the "material" (hulikos), the "animate" (psukhikos), and the "spiritual" (pneumatikos). The "material" humans are those who have not attained to intellectual life, and so place their hopes only upon that which is perishable—for these there is no hope of salvation. The "animate" are those who have only a half-formed conception of the true God, and so must live a life devoted to holy works, and persistence in faith; according to Ptolemy, these are the "ordinary" Christians. Finally, there are the "spiritual" humans, the Gnostics, who need no faith, since they have actual knowledge (gnôsis) of intellectual reality, and are thus saved by nature (Irenaeus 1.6.2, 1.6.4). The Valentinian-Ptolemaic notion of salvation rests on the idea that the cosmos is the concrete manifestation or hypostatization of the desire of Sophia for knowledge of the Father, and the "passions" her failure produced. The history of salvation, then, for human beings, has the character of an external manifestation of the threefold process of Sophia's own redemption: recognition of her passion; her consequent "turning back" (epistrophê); and finally, her act of spiritual production, whence arose Gnostic humanity (cf. Irenaeus 1.5.1). Salvation, then, in its final form, must imply a sort of spiritual creation on the part of the Gnostics who attain the Pleroma. The "animate" humans, however, who are composed partly of corruptible matter and partly of the spiritual essence, must remain content with a simple restful existence with the craftsman of the cosmos, since no material element can enter the Pleroma (Irenaeus 1.7.1).

In his Epistle to Flora (in Epiphanius 33.3.1-33.7.10), which is an attempt to convert an "ordinary" Christian woman to his brand of Valentinian Christianity, Ptolemy clearly formulates his doctrine of the relation between the God of the Hebrew Scriptures, who is merely "just," and the Ineffable Father, who is the Supreme Good. Rather than simply declaring these two gods to be unrelated, as did Marcion, Ptolemy develops a complex, allegorical reading of the Hebrew Scriptures in relation to the New Testament in order to establish a genealogy connecting the Pleroma, Sophia and her "passion," the Demiurge, and the salvific activity of Jesus Christ. The scope and rigor of Ptolemy's work, and the influence it came to exercise on emerging Christian orthodoxy, qualifies him as one of the most important of the early Christian theologians, both proto-orthodox and "heretical."

c. Mani and Manichaeism

The world religion founded by Mani (216-276 CE) and known to history as Manichaeism has its roots in the East, borrowing elements from Persian dualistic religion (Zoroastrianism), Jewish Christianity, Buddhism, and even Mithraism. The system developed by Mani was self-consciously syncretistic, which was a natural outgrowth of his desire to see his religion reach the ends of the earth. This desire was fulfilled, and until the late Middle Ages, Manichaeism remained a world religion, stretching from China to Western Europe. It is now completely extinct. The religion began when its founder experienced a series of visions, in which the Holy Spirit supposedly appeared to him, ordering him to preach the revelation of Light to the ends of the earth. Mani came to view himself as the last in a series of great prophets including Buddha, Zoroaster, Jesus, and Paul (Rudolph, p. 339). His highly complex myth of the origin of the cosmos and of humankind drew on various elements culled from these several traditions and teachings. The doctrine of Mani is not "philosophical," in the manner of Basilides, Valentinus or Ptolemy; for Mani's teaching was not the product of a more or less rational or systematic speculation about the godhead, resulting in Gnosis, but the wholly creative product of what he felt to be a revelation from the divinity itself. It is for this reason that Mani's followers revered him as the redeemer and holy teacher of humankind (Rudolph, p. 339). Since Manichaeism belongs more to the history of religion than to philosophy proper (or even the fringes of philosophy, as does Western Gnosticism), it will suffice to say only a few words about the system, if for no other reason than that the great Christian philosopher Augustine of Hippo had followed the Manichaen religion for several years, before converting to Christianity (cf. Augustine, Confessions III.10).

The main point of distinction between the doctrine of Mani and the Western branch of Gnosticism (Basilides, Valentinus, etc.), is that in Manichaeism the "cosmology is subservient to the soteriology" (Rudolph, p. 336). This means, essentially, that Mani began with a fundamental belief about the nature of humanity and its place in the cosmos, and concocted a myth to explain the situation of humankind, and the dynamics of humanity's eventual salvation. The details of the cosmology were apparently not important, their sole purpose being to illustrate, poetically, the dangers facing the souls dwelling in this "realm of darkness" as well as the manner of their redemption from this place. The Manichaean cosmology began with two opposed first principles, as in Zoroastrianism: the God of Light, and the Ruler of Darkness. This Darkness, being of a chaotic nature, assails the "Kingdom of Light" in an attempt to overthrow or perhaps assimilate it. The "King of the Paradise of Light," then, goes on the defensive, as it were, and brings forth Wisdom, who in her turn gives birth to the Primal Man, also called Ohrmazd (or Ahura-Mazda). This Primal Man possesses a pentadic soul, consisting of fire, water, wind, light, and ether. Armored with this soul, the Primal Man descends into the Realm of Darkness to battle with its Ruler. Surprisingly, the Primal Man is defeated, and his soul scattered throughout the Realm of Darkness. However, the Manichaeans understood this as a plan on the part of the Ruler of Light to sow the seeds of resistance within the Darkness, making possible the eventual overthrow of the chaotic realm. To this end, a second "Living Spirit" is brought forth, who was also called Mithra. This being, and his partner, "Light-Adamas," set in motion the history of salvation by putting forth the "call" within the realm of darkness, which recalls the scattered particles of light (from the vanquished soul of Ohrmazd). These scattered particles "answer" Mithra, and the result is the formation of the heavens and earth, the stars and planets, and finally, the establishment of the twelve signs of the zodiac and the ordered revolution of the cosmic sphere, through which, by a gradual process, the scattered particles of light will eventually be returned to the Realm of Light. The Manichaeans believed that these particles ascend to the moon, and that when the moon is full, it empties these particles into the sun, from whence they ascend to the "new Aeon," also identified with Mithra, the "Living Spirit" (Rudolph, pp. 336-337). This process will continue throughout the ages of the world, until all the particles eventually reach their proper home and the salvation of the godhead is complete.

It should be clear from this brief exposition that humanity as such does not hold the prime place in the salvific drama of Manichaeism, but rather a part of the godhead itself—that is, the scattered soul of Ohrmazd. The purpose of humanity in this scheme is to aid the particles of light in their ascent to the godhead. Of course, these particles dwell within every living thing, and so the salvation of these particles is the salvation of humanity, but only by default, as it were; humanity does not hold a privileged position in Manichaeism, as it does in the Western or strictly Christian Gnostic schools. This belief led the Manichaeans to establish strict dietary and purity laws, and even to require selected members of their church to provide meals for the "Elect," so that the latter would not become defiled by harming anything containing light particles. All of this, however, is a long way from philosophy. Hans Jonas was right to describe Manichaeism as representing "a more archaic level of gnostic thought" (Jonas, p. 206). Now that we have examined one of the non-philosophical directions taken by Gnostic thought, let us proceed to discuss its role in the philosophical development of the era.

3. Platonism and Gnosticism

Long before the advent of Gnosticism, Plato had posited two contrary World Souls: one "which does good" and one "which has the opposite capacity" (Plato, Laws X. 896e, tr. Saunders). For Plato, this did not imply that the cosmos is under the control of a corrupt or ignorant god, as it did for the Gnostics, but simply that this cosmos, like the human soul, possesses a rational and an irrational part, and that it is the task of the rational part to govern the irrational. The question arose, however, among Platonists, regarding Plato's true position on this matter. Was he declaring that a part of the cosmos is evil? or that the divine Demiurge (who, in the highly influential Timaeus account, is said to have crafted the cosmos) actually produced an evil soul? Both of these conjectures flew in the face of everything that the ancient thinkers believed about the cosmos—that is, that it was divine, orderly, and perfect. A common solution, among both Platonists and Pythagoreans, was to interpret the second or "evil" Soul as Matter, that is, the material or generative principle, which is the opposite of the truly divine and unchanging Forms. The purpose of the Intellectual principle, or the "good" Soul, is to bring this disorderly principle under the control of reason, and thereby maintain an everlasting but not eternal cosmos (cf. Timaeus 37d). Since the cosmos, according to Plato in the Timaeus, cannot be as perfect as the eternal image upon which it is founded, a generative principle is necessary to maintain the "living creature" (which is precisely how the cosmos is described), and therefore not really "evil," even though it possesses the "opposite capacity" (generation, and hence, corruption) from that of the Good or Rational Soul.

a. Numenius of Apamea and Neo-Platonism

Several centuries after Plato, around the time when the great Gnostic thinkers like Valentinus and Ptolemy were developing their systems, we encounter the Platonic philosopher Numenius of Apamea (fl. 150 CE). The main ideas of Numenius' philosophy, preserved in the fragments of his writings that survive, bear clear traces of Gnostic influence. His cosmology describes, in language strikingly similar to that of the Gnostics, the degradation of the divine dêmiourgos upon his contact with pre-existent Matter (hulê, or the "indefinite" principle):

[I]n the process of coming into contact with Matter, which is the Dyad, [the Demiurge] gives unity to it, but is Himself divided by it, since Matter has a character prone to desire [epithumêtikon êthos] and is in flux. So in virtue of not being in contact with the Intelligible (which would mean being turned in upon Himself), by reason of looking towards Matter and taking thought for it, He becomes unregarding (aperioptos) of Himself. And he seizes upon the sense realm and ministers to it and yet draws it up to His own character, as a result of this yearning towards Matter [eporexamenos tês hulês] (Numenius, Fragment 11, in Dillon 1977, The Middle Platonists, pp. 367-368).

In this fragment, Numenius is transferring a basic Gnostic anthropological idea into the realm of cosmology. It is a common feature of Gnostic systems to describe the individual human soul's contact with the material realm as resulting in a forgetting of the soul's true origin. Platonism, also, warned against the soul's becoming too attached to the realm of the senses, since this realm is changing and illusory, and does not accurately reflect the divinity. However, neither Platonism nor Gnosticism described such a danger as affecting, in any way, the Demiurge; for the Gnostics declared the Demiurge to be just as much a part of the cosmos as he was its ruler, and the orthodox Platonists located the Demiurge outside the cosmos, declaring the cosmos to be self-sufficient (following Timaeus 34b). Numenius, however, went further and bridged the gap between the sensible cosmos and the Intelligible Realm by linking the Demiurge to the latter by way of contemplation, and to the former by way of his "desire" (orexis) for matter. In Fragment 18, Numenius tells us that the Demiurge derives his "critical faculty" (kritikon) from his contemplation of the Good, and his "impulsive faculty" (hormêtikon) from his attachment to Matter (Dillon, p. 370). This idea seems to foreshadow Plotinus' doctrine that the individual soul will always take on certain characteristics of Matter, and that these characteristics manifest themselves in the form of sense perceptions that must be brought under the controlling influence of rational judgment (cf. Enneads I.8.9 and I.1.7). Unlike Plotinus, however, who leaves the World-Soul or active part of the Demiurge safely beyond the affective cosmic realm, Numenius posits a Demiurge that is both transcendent and immanent, and arrives at a doctrine of a cosmos that, even on the highest level—the level of the celestial bodies—is not devoid of evil influence, since even the Demiurge, the highest cosmic deity, is infected by the tainting influence of Matter. "This importation of evil into the celestial realm is surely more Gnostic than Platonist, and did not comment itself to such successors as Plotinus or Porphyry, though it does seem to be accepted by Iamblichus" (Dillon, p. 374).

Plotinus, during the height of his teaching career at Rome (ca. 255 CE), composed a treatise "Against Those Who Declare the Creator of This World, and the World Itself, to be Evil," also known, simply, as "Against the Gnostics" (Ennead II.9) in which he argues for the divinity and goodness of the cosmos, and upholds the ancient Greek belief in the divinity of the stars and planets, declaring them to be our "noble brethren," and responsible only for the good things that befall humankind. Porphyry, in his Life of Plotinus, tells us that Plotinus commissioned him, along with his fellow student Amelius, to write more treatises attacking the Gnostics on points that Plotinus skipped over (Porphyry, Life of Plotinus 16). Porphyry also mentions by name two Gnostic treatises that were discovered in Egypt in 1945, and are now readily available to scholars: Zostrianos, and Allogenes, in the Nag Hammadi Collection of Codices. These texts, as well as the Tripartite Tractate (also in the Nag Hammadi Collection) show how tightly Platonism and Gnosticism were intertwined in the early centuries of our era.

4. Concluding Summary

Gnosticism began with the same basic, pre-philosophical intuition that guided the development of Greek philosophy—that there is a dichotomy between the realm of true, unchanging Being, and ever-changing Becoming. However, unlike the Greeks, who strived to find the connection between and overall unity of these two "realms," the Gnostics amplified the differences, and developed a mytho-logical doctrine of humankind's origin in the realm of Being, and eventual fall into the realm of darkness or matter, that is, Becoming. This general Gnostic myth came to exercise an influence on emerging Christianity, as well as upon Platonic philosophy, and even, in the East, developed into a world religion (Manichaeism) that spread across the known world, surviving until the late Middle Ages. In the twentieth century, there began a renewed interest in Gnostic ideas, particularly in the pioneering work of Hans Jonas, the Existentialist philosopher and student of Martin Heidegger. The psychologist Carl Jung, as well, drew upon Gnostic motifs in his theoretical work, and the increasing emphasis on Hermeneutics in late twentieth century thought owes something to the analyses of Gnostic myth and exegesis done by Harold Bloom, Paul Ricoeur, and others.

More than any of these accomplishments, however, it was the discovery in 1945, in Egypt, of a large collection of Coptic Gnostic codices, now known as the Nag Hammadi Collection, or the Nag Hammadi Library. This collection contains works of the Valentinian School, as well as of many earlier and contemporaneous sects, and sheds much needed light on the nature and structure of what to this day is still called, with some reservations, the Gnostic Religion. The study of this library has led certain scholars to question the existence of any unified movement called "Gnosticism" or the "Gnostic Religion." Michael Allen Williams, in 1996, published a book entitled Rethinking "Gnosticism": An Argument For Dismantling A Dubious Category (Princeton University Press 1996). Through a detailed study of numerous texts of the Nag Hammadi Collection, Williams attempts to show that the extreme diversity underlying the texts that many scholars have lumped together under the catch-all phrase of "Gnosticism," casts doubt on the existence of anything like a Gnostic religion. Moreover, he argues, such a wholesale consignment of these texts to what is, in fact, a modern designation, blinds us to the deeper meaning of these diverse intellectual monuments. It should be noted, however, that the early Church Fathers, like Clement of Alexandria, Irenaeus, Origen, Hippolytus, Epiphanius, and even "pagan" philosophers like Plotinus and Porphyry, who have preserved for us accounts and occasionally some original documents of philosophers and theologians whom they term "Gnostic," were also contemporaries or near contemporaries of many of the figures and schools that they criticize and interpret. The insights of these writers, then, who were living and working side by side, and almost always in conflict with, members of the Gnostic sects, should be given priority over any modern attempts to revise our understanding of what Gnosticism is.

5. References and Further Reading

a. Sources

  • Dillon, John (1977). "Numenius of Apamea" in The Middle Platonists (Cornell University Press).
  • Filoramo, Giovanni. A History of Gnosticism, tr. Anthony Alcock (Oxford: Blackwell Publishers 1990, 1992).
  • Hegel, G.W.F. "The Gnostics" in Lectures on the History of Philosophy, vol 2. "Plato and the Platonists," tr. E.S. Haldane and Frances H. Simson (University of Nebraska Press; Bison Books Edition 1995).
  • Jonas, Hans (1958, 2001). The Gnostic Religion: The Message of the Alien God and the Beginnings of Christianity (Boston: Beacon Press).
  • Layton, Bentley (1987). The Gnostic Scriptures (Doubleday: The Anchor Bible Reference Library).
  • Plato. Laws, tr. Trevor J. Saunders, in Plato: Complete Works, ed. John M. Cooper (Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing 1997).
  • Plato. Timaeus, tr. Donald J. Zeyl, in Plato: Complete Works.
  • Plotinus. The Enneads, tr. A.H. Armstrong, in 7 volumes (Harvard: Loeb Classical Library 1966).
  • Ricoeur, Paul. The Conflict of Interpretations (Northwestern University Press 1974).
  • Rudolph, Kurt. Gnosis: The Nature and History of Gnosticism, tr. Robert McLachlan Wilson (Edinburgh: T. and T. Clark Ltd. 1984).
  • Segal, Robert A. (ed.) The Gnostic Jung (Princeton University Press 1992).

b. Suggestions for Further Reading

  • Barnstone, Willis (1984 ed.) The Other Bible (Harper San Francisco).
  • Bultmann, Rudolph (1956). Primitive Christianity in its Contemporary Setting (New York: Meridian Books).
  • Fideler, David (1993). Jesus Christ, Sun of God: Ancient Cosmology and Early Christian Symbolism (Wheaton, Illinois: Quest Books).
  • Pagels, Elaine (1975). The Gnostic Paul: Gnostic Exegesis of the Pauline Letters (Philadelphia: Trinity Press).
  • Williams, Michael Allen. Rethinking "Gnosticism": An Argument For Dismantling A Dubious Category (Princeton University Press 1996).

Author Information

Edward Moore
St. Elias School of Orthodox Theology
U. s. A.

The Garden of Epicurus

A garden near the city of Athens, owned and used by the philosopher Epicurus and his followers. It became a symbol of Epicurean philosophy.

Table of Contents

  1. Location and Use
  2. References and Further Reading

1. Location and Use

In 307/306 BCE the Athenian philosopher Epicurus bought a house with a garden just outside Athens along the road from the Dipylon gate to the Academy (CiceroDe Finibus 5.1.3). Other great founders of philosophical schools had chosen public areas for their teaching: Plato established his school near the Academy, Isocrates and Aristotle taught in the Lyceum, Zeno often met his students in the Stoa Poecile. In contrast, Epicurus' hedonistic and materialistic philosophy flourished and grew amidst the privately owned groves of his Garden. The Garden itself - apart from the city, a private space, and pleasurable - became a symbol for the detachment and hedonism of the Epicurean school. Nothing of the Garden's layout is known, but its closeness to the canalized Eridanus River must have provided plentiful water for irrigation of its trees and plants. After Epicurus' death the Garden was passed down to his followers (Diogenes Laertius, 10.10 and 10.17). We may imagine that Epicureans seeking relief from the disturbances of the city gathered in the Garden's groves for many centuries.

2. References and Further Reading

  • Furley, David John. "Epicurus" in the Oxford Classical Dictionary. Third Edition. Oxford 1996.
  • Wycherley, R.E. The Stones of Athens. Princeton 197

Author Information

William Morison
Grand Valley State University

Galen (130—200 C.E.)


Galen was one of the most prominent ancient physicians as well as a philosopher (though most of his philosophical writings are lost). Nonetheless, his philosophical interests are quite evident in his practice of biological science. Galen made some key anatomical observations (though most of these were on other primates).  However, this inclination toward observation moved his theory into the class of critical empiricism.

Galen was also a well-read scholar who combined extensive erudition with ‘cutting edge’ observational practice to completely change the understanding and teaching of medicine. He frequently integrates his observational practice with the natural philosophy of Plato and Aristotle.  His position as the leading authority in medical theory extended for at least fourteen hundred years.

Galen correctly saw that there is a methodological difference between taking account of the patient in front of you in all of the patient’s particularity and, instead, understanding the patient in front of you as representing an instance of a general rule of biomedical science. The way that Galen sought to insert himself into this debate makes his conclusions relevant to medicine today.


Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Hellenistic Schools of Medicine
  3. Method
  4. Galen's Critical Empiricism
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Life

Galen of Pergamum was a physician who was born in Pergamum was a bustling and vibrant city at the time and was particularly famous for its statue of Asclepius, a god of healing. Throughout Galen's life, he avowed a devotion to Asclepius. The city also had a library that almost rivaled Alexandria's in its size. Galen's father, Nicon, was a prosperous architect. This allowed Galen the leisure to get an education and choose a path of life unencumbered by the need to earn money. However, this affluence did not mean that Galen was brought up "soft" (as per Plato's discussion in the Republic 544b-570e in which he discusses the devolution of political systems due to the decay of personal arête). Galen's education was broad and directed by his father. Galen studied in mathematics (a particular favorite of his father), grammar, logic, and philosophy--that included inquiry into the four major schools of the time: the Platonists, the Peripatetics, the Stoics, and the Epicureans. This pluralistic sensibility influenced the philosophical/scientific method of Galen. According to pluralism, one should look at all the prevalent theories and then make up one's own mind choosing either one of the theories or perhaps a new mixture of those presented according to their strengths.

Galen began his study of medicine around the age of sixteen when his father had a dream suggesting this direction. Galen traveled to Smyrna and Corinth to study with both a Rationalist and with an Empiricist. When Galen's father died, Galen traveled to Egypt (Alexandria) where he lived for perhaps five years (152-157). What Galen might have studied in Alexandria is highly speculative. However, Galen, himself, later declares that students should "look at the human skeleton with your own eyes. This is very easy in Alexandria, so that the physicians of that area instruct their pupils with the aid of autopsy" (Kühn II, 220, translation L. Edelstein). This quotation points to the practice of autopsy (dissection of cadavers) in Alexandria. Whether Galen also studied anatomy this way is unclear. It is clear that Galen (at least) engaged in comparative anatomy by dissecting monkeys.

In 157 Galen returned to his hometown to become a surgeon to the gladiators. When civil unrest broke out in 162, Galen left for Rome. The medical community in Rome was competitive and corrupt. In Rome, Galen's ambition got the best of him with the result that his high profile created powerful enemies who caused him to depart secretly in 166. After a couple of years in obscurity, Galen was recalled by the Roman Emperors Marcus Aurelius and Lucius Verus to serve the army in their war against the Germans. When the plague hit Rome, Galen was made personal physician to Marcus Aurelius and Aurelius' son, Commodus. For many years it has been held that Galen remained in Roman society until his death around 199-200 (based upon the Suda Lexicon written around 1000); however, new research by Vivian Nutton has persuasively set the date of Galen's death much later. Nutton proposes that Galen may have lived into his eighties (possibly as old as 87). The source for this new information comes from Byzantine and Arab scholars from the sixth century onwards. On the basis of this, it seems that Galen died around 216, give or take several years, in the reign of Caracalla.

A great many of Galen's works have survived. The Kühn edition of Galen (Greek with a Latin translation) runs over 20,000 pages. There are other Galenic works that only exist in Arabic translations. However, many of Galen's works are lost, e.g., many of his treatises on philosophy (logic, physics, and ethics) perished in a fire that consumed the Temple of Peace in 191.

2. Hellenistic Schools of Medicine

During the end of the fourth century BCE and throughout the third century BCE there were enormous advances in medicine revolving around the principal practitioners: Diocles, Praxagoras, Herophilus, and Erasistratus. During this period the debate about the relative roles of theory and observation were central to these writers (Kühn X, 107). It is, in fact, a perennial question in the philosophy of science. What is at issue is when does one impose a theoretical structure on the world? Part of the answer concerns the origins of the theoretical structure. From whence did it arise? In part, this is a struggle for a logic of induction that might assist the practitioner. Without such a theory of inductive logic, it is unclear whether nature is revealing her nature to the careful observer or whether the observer is imposing his own ideas upon nature. Aristotle discusses some of these issues in Posterior Analytics II.19 and in The Parts of Animals I. However, this is not the end of the question. Some of this tension can be seen in the biomedical writers in the Hippocratic era. However, it is also true that in the construction of scientific theories there must, of necessity, be a tension between those who embrace theoretical structures and those who are skeptical of them. The latter group generally bases their misgivings upon a possible tendency among theorists to create an a priori science. What makes a priori science troublesome is that it breaks contact with the empirical world. It suggests that ratiocination about natural causes is sufficient for the production of scientific theories. For most natural philosophers such a stance is entirely unacceptable. Setting the proper balance between theory and observation was (and continues to me) an important question in the philosophy of science.

One group that added to the debate on the role of observation were the Empiricists. The origins of the Empiricist School might be found in Acron of Akragas, a fifth century BCE follower of Empedocles. This conjecture is based merely upon the testimony of later writers. It could certainly be the case that there was no real medical empiricism, as such, before Serapion, a third century BCE doctor .

Another interesting speculation on the origins of the empiricist physicians comes from Michael Frede. Frede has suggested that from a reference in Plato's Laws 720a-c; 857c-d that there was a two-tired medical system with physicians for the wealthy (who employed theoretical principles) and physicians for the slaves (who relied merely upon trial-and-error experience). If this speculation is correct, then the burden of proof for the empiricists is to show that the theoretical "book learning" of upper class doctors could be reduced to mere experience. In other words, experience, itself, could generate competence. The result would be an elevation of the second-level physician. If Frede is correct on this, then perhaps social situation is partially responsible for the rise of the medical empiricists.

Sextus Empiricus (circa 160-210) set out a loosely woven doctrine of "consideration" or skepsis. Sextus is a key source of our knowledge of Pyrrhonism and is also said to have been a physician (though his writings on medicine have not survived). It is not clear whether Sextus was an original thinker or merely a reflection of his era. However, at the very least, one can garner background information of what might have influenced the empiricists through the doctrine of skepsis. Under this doctrine the theoretical structures of the philosophers (Dogmatists) would be held in abeyance (neither accepted nor rejected). What would rule the day would be the case before the physician right now. The case and the physician's experience would dictate the treatment.

Against the Empiricists, on the other hand, were the philosophers (Dogmatists). In one important way the Dogmatists are not a "school" as such. They are often depicted by their detractors, such as the Empiricists, rather than being self-identifying. This may relate to the social class dynamics noted earlier. Thus, one should keep in mind that the group is not so much a school of practitioners but a depiction of a group by objectors to those who profess a foundation in medical theory. Perhaps the best way to characterize the Dogmatists would be on the issue of aetiology. The Empiricists attacked the Dogmatists for asserting that there might be hidden causes of disease, and that these hidden causes might be grasped via ratiocination. This was because (under this characterization) the Dogmatists were advocating reasoning and conjecture over experience. To the Empiricists, this was akin to creating a priori science.

The Dogmatists (even in this quasi-class depiction) were identified with one of the four prominent philosophical schools (Platonists, Aristotelians/Peripatetics, Stoics, and Epicureans). Detractors said that the Dogmatists honored theory over observation and experience. Of course, from the point of view of the philosophical schools, rational theories create a critical structure that aid in the interpretation and explanation of nature. The sense of explanation here harkens back to Aristotle, who distinguished knowing the fact (hoti) and the reasoned fact (dioti, APo II, i). It may not be enough to know that if I (as a physician) do x, then y will result (anecdotal correlation of two events). That sort of hoti (or merely event + consequence unit) is insufficient. The reason for this is that when circumstances alter slightly, how is the practitioner to know whether this alteration is significant unless he also has an appreciation of the mechanism that underlies the process? For example, anecdotal correlation might (in a non-medical modern example) suggest that every time I wash my car, it will rain. My personal experience may be almost perfect, but that does not mean that such a causal connection actually exists. The reluctance to embrace a non-observable causal mechanism leaves this dilemma to those who profess an aversion to theory in favor of experience.

Somewhat in the middle of these two schools were the Methodists. Aside from Soranus there are no surviving texts of the Methodists. Therefore most of what we have comes from the descriptions of Galen and pseudo-Galen on these writers. The following are cited as being Methodists: Thessalos, Themison, Proklos, Reginos, Antipatros, Eudemos, Mnaseas, Philon, Dionysios, Menemachos, Olympikos, Apollonides, Soranus, Julianus (Kühn X, 52-53, XIV, 684). There is some controversy about the characterization and origins of this school but many relate it to Themison of Laodicea a pupil of Asclepiades of Bithynia. However this attribution is disputed by Celsus and Soranus who state that Themison is not the first but merely a representative of Methodism. At any rate, the Methodists paid attention (in contrast to the Dogmatists and Empiricists) to the disease alone as opposed to the situation of the individual patient, that is, his medical history and personal situation. The disease alone dictates treatment (Kühn III, 14-20). Thus, the physician does not have to have anatomical or physiological knowledge of the body. Instead, he observes the body in a holistic manner (koinotetes). The three principle conditions of a body viewed in this way are: (a) the body's dryness, (b) the body's fluidity, and (c) the mixture of the two. The "method" to be followed was to follow the phenomena. Underlying this assumption was the notion about the status of pores in the mechanism of the body's common balance. The body's pores allowed atoms to enter and exit the body. When the atoms came and went freely health was the result. When there was a disruption, then sickness was the result. When the pores were either too small (constriction) or too large (dilatation) then an imbalance occurred in the normal atomic flow. Atoms are invisible to the naked eye. Pores are visible, but their subtle alterations are often not visibly detectable. Thus, on the face of it, the Methodists seem to be contra-Empiricist. However, the atomist tradition (upon which this theory rests) was taken to be Empiricist. (In principle, one could view an entirely physical event-if it were possible to witness it.) Thus, the Methodists seem to have affinities to both. This is evident in Themison (first century, BCE) and Thessalus (first century, AD). Disease was depicted as a community of constriction or dilatation (or some combination of the two) that, in principle, was observable even though, in practice, it couldn't be observed except through its effects, namely, the disease. Thus, though the intent of the Methodists was probably to lean toward the Empiricists, the actual practice put them more in-between.

Galen often characterizes himself as an eclectic belonging to no school. It is true that Galen was an innovator in observation, for example he gave the first depiction of the four-chambered human heart. But his epistemology was grounded in his philosophical training. Over and over Galen relies on an over-arching medical theory to drive his aetiology (Kühn X, 123, 159, 246). In this way his practice is closest to Aristotelian critical empiricism that requires careful observation and a comprehensive theory that will make those observations meaningful.

3. Method

Because of Galen's pluralistic method, it is appropriate that (for the most part) his own method draws upon his predecessors with additions and corrections. For example, Galen employed the four-element theory (earth, air, fire, and water) as well as the theories of the contraries (hot, cold, wet, and dry). Though Aristotle interrelated these two descriptive accounts in his work Generation and Corruption, it is Galen who attempts to create a more gradated form by making quasi-quantitative categories of the contraries to describe the material composition of the mixtures (On Mixtures). From the perspective of modern science, this is an advancement upon Aristotle. This work on mixtures is also used to account for the properties of drugs (On Simples). Drugs were supposed to counteract the disposition of the body. Thus, if a patient were suffering from cold and wet (upper respiratory infection), then the appropriate drug would be one that is hot and dry (such as certain molds and fungi-does this remind you of penicillin?). The use of broad-reaching natural principles enhanced the explanatory power of Galen's theory of biological science.

Galen speaks at length about the philosophers Plato (from whom he accepts the tri-partite soul) and Aristotle (whose biological works are well known to him). In medicine, he is also greatly influenced by historical figures such as Hippocrates (who he describes as a single individual opposed to our modern understanding of a group of writers-even though Galen was aware of the Hippocratic Question), Herophilus, and especially Erasistratus. In his avowed work on biological theory, On the Natural Faculties, Galen goes to great lengths to refute the principles of Erasistratus and his followers.

Contemporary figures are also discussed such as Aclepiades, and the Methodists Themison and Thessalus. This thorough use of the context of medicine allows Galen to consider, for example, Eristrates' theory of mechanical digestion via a vacuum principle and to supplant it with his own theory of attraction (holke). Galen's theory of attraction may have had its roots in the theory of natural place that always lacked a material force to implement it. At any rate, when the mechanisms are inscrutable, it was important for Galen to offer an account that fits into other parts of his theory (such as the mixture of the contraries in the composition of the elements).

One of the most influential aspects of Galenic practice was his implementation of (or invention of-as per Wesley Smith) the Hippocratic theory of the four humours (phlegm, blood, black bile, and yellow bile). These points of focus relate to a theory of health as balance. Each of these four humours is related to the three principal points of the body: head (phlegm), heart (blood), black bile (liver) and yellow bile (the liver's complement, the gall bladder). The three principal points of the body are also loosely linked to the Platonic tripartite soul: head (sophia, reason), heart (thumos, emotion or spiritedness), liver (epithumos, desire). Thus, the sort of just balance of the soul that Plato argues for in the Republic is also the ground of natural health. When one part of the soul/body is out of balance, then the individual becomes ill. The physician's job is to assist the patient in maintaining balance. If a person is too full of uncontrollable emotion or spiritedness, for example, then he is suffering from too much blood. The obvious answer is to engage in bloodletting (guaranteed to calm a person down). As in the case of pharmacology and the contraries, the four humours provide a comprehensive account of what it means to obtain and maintain health via the balancing of various primary principles.

4. Galen's Critical Empiricism

One of the striking features of ancient medicine is the extent that very limited observations had to be interpreted in order to explain natural function. For example, given that blood was considered to be nourishment, trophe, it seemed reasonable (following Aristotle) that the blood would be entirely consumed by the body's tissue. Thus, the blood would be manufactured in the liver and heart and then would flow to the rest of the body and be consumed. The flow of blood went one-way. However, there was a problem: there were two sorts of blood vessels (veins and arteries). These were structurally distinct. This was known through dissection of primates. Then it is assumed that Nature does nothing in vain (discussed at length in On the Use of the Parts as a key biomedical explanatory principle). This means that the veins and arteries have different functions. But they cannot be too disparate. The answer to this dilemma for Galen is that the arteries carry blood mixed with aer or pneuma that acts as a vital force whereas the venous blood is ordinary-though Galen held (correctly) that the two systems were connected by tiny almost invisible vessels (capillaries).

Thus Galen began with a problem and a number of observations and sought to make sense of the seeming anomalies via his overarching biomedical principles. In this way, Galen was acting according to the mathematical training from his father and a desire to create a unified (quasi-axiomatic) explanatory system. Without observation, this could have led to a priori or "armchair" science. But when combined with careful observation, it leads to critical empiricism.

Another example of this mixture of observation and inference is in the area of conception theory. Galen says in his treatise, On Seed,

These things have been said by me because of some of the philosophers who call themselves Aristotelians and Peripatetics. I, at least, would not address these men so, they being so greatly ignorant of the opinion of Aristotle that they think it is pleasing to him that the sperm of the male being cast into the uterus of the female places the principle of motion in the katamenia (the female seed) and, after this is expelled, the principle of motion in the katamenia and, after it is expelled, does not any part become the corporeal substance of the fetus. They have been deceived by the first book of the Generation of Animals that alone of the five they seem to have read. These things are written there, "As we said, of the generation of the principles we may say that chiefly there are the male principle and the female principle. The male offers the motive principle and the efficient cause of generation while the female offers the material principle" [Galen quoting Aristotle, G.A. 716a 5].

These are not far after the beginning: in still later parts of the tract he writes as well, "But this may be well concluded that the male provides the form and the principle of motion and the female provides the body and the matter just as the example of curding milk. Here the body is the milk and the fig juice contains the principle that makes it curdle" [Galen quoting Aristotle, G.A. 729a 10; Kühn IV, 516-517, my tr.].

The biological accounts of human reproduction in the ancient world offer excellent examples of the interaction between observation and inference. There are a number of issues involved in this issue that pre-dates even the Hippocratic writers. The one that is mentioned here is the issue of whether there is one seed (the male's only) or two (the male's and the female's). In the above example Galen seems to be saying that the first reading of Aristotle in which the male provides the efficient cause and the female provides the material cause, simpliciter, is a misreading of Aristotle. Instead, the event (conception) is depicted as a more involved process in which principles of both parents come into play. These principles revolve around the empirically observable facts that children as often as not resemble the mother as much as the father. The "one seed" theory in which the father's seed, alone, fashions the child can only account for such an outcome by calling it a sort of mutation (agone, para physin). But regularity counts for something. It is odd when an event that may approach or exceed 50% is called a mutation. This turns the entire idea of mutation (a statistical anomaly) on its head.

Galen approaches the issue with a balanced approach beginning with anatomical observations. Galen did some of the most extensive work in the ancient world on the study of the female anatomy (albeit mostly upon apes, On Anatomical Procedures, I.2). Galen's observation of a fluid in the horns of the uterus (Kühn IV, 594, 600-601) were the basis of his (mistaken) view that he had discovered female seed. However, in the midst of this mistake he was on the right track in viewing the ovaries as analogous to the male testes.

The point in this second example is that Galen wanted to combine his observations gained in dissections of apes to his pronouncements vis-à-vis the debate concerning "one seed conception" vs. "two seed conception." This commitment to integrating observation and theory contributed to making Galen a towering figure in medicine and the philosophy of science.

5. Select Bibliography

Primary Texts

  • Galeni Opera Omnia. Basel: Par'Andrea to Kratandro, 1538.Kühn, C.G. Galeni Opera Omnia. Leipzig: C. Cnobloch, 1821-1833, rpt. Hildesheim, 1965.
    • This is still the standard edition though it is very gradually being supplanted by the Corpus Medicorum Graecorum Leipzig, 1914-present.

Key Texts in Translation

  • Abhandlung darüber, dass der vorzügliche Arzt Philosoph sein muss. [Quod optimus medicus sit idem philosophus] translated by Peter Bachmann. Göttingen: Vanderhoeck & Ruprecht, 1996.L'Áme et ses passions: Les passions et les erreurs de l'áme. Translated and notes by Vincent Barras. Paris: Les Belle Lettres, 1995.
  • Galen on Antecedent Causes. Edited and translated with introduction and commentary by R.J. Hankinson. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1998.
  • Galen on Bloodletting. Translated by Peter Brain. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1986.
  • Galen on Food and Diet. Translated and notes by Mark Grant. London: Routledge, 2000.
  • Galen's Institutio logica. Translated with commentary by John Spangler Kieffer. Baltimore: Johns Hopkins University Press, 1964.
  • Galen on Language and Ambiguity (De captionibus). Translated with commentary by Robert Blair Edlow. Leiden: Brill, 1977.
  • Galen on the Natural Faculties. Translated by Arthur John Brock. London: Heineiman, Ltd., 1952. Loeb series.
  • Galen on the Usefulness of the Parts of the Body {De usu partium). Translated with commentary by Margaret Tallmadge May. Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press, 1968.
  • Galen, The Therapeutic Method: Books 1 & 2 (De methodo medendi). Edited and translated by R.J. Hankinson. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1991.

Selected Secondary Sources

  • Barnes, Jonathan. "A Third Sort of Syllogism: Galen and the Logic of Relations" in Modern Thinkers and Ancient Thinkers. R. W. Sharples, ed. Boulder, CO: Westview Press, 1993.Boylan, Michael. "Galen's Conception Theory" Journal of the History of Biology 19.1 (1986): 44-77.
  • Boudon-Millot, ed, fr. tr. Introduction génerale; sur ses propres livres que l’excellent médecin devienne philosophe. Paris: Les Belles Lettres, 2007.
  • Boudon-Millot, And Alessia Guardasole, and Caroline Magdelaine, eds. La science médicale antique: nouveaux regards: etudes reunites en l’honneur de Jacques Jouanna. Paris: Beauchesne, 2007.
  • Boylan, Michael. “Galen on the Blood, Pulse, and Arteries” Journal of the History of Biology 40.2 (2007): 207-230.
  • Boylan, Michael. "The Hippocratic and Galenic Challenges to Aristotle's Conception Theory" Journal of the History of Biology 15.1 (1984): 83-112.
  • Connell, Sophia. "Aristotle and Galen on Sex Difference and Reproduction: A New Approach to an Ancient Rivalry." Studies in History and the Philosophy of Science. 31-a.3(2000):405-427.
  • Cosans, Christopher E. "The Experimental Foundations of Galen's Teleology" Studies in History and Philosophy of Science. 29A.1 (1998): 63-90.
  • Crombie, A. C. Augustine to Galileo. Vol. 1. London: Heinemann, 1961.
  • DeLacy, Philip. "Galen's Platonism" American Journal of Philology. 93 (1972): 27-39.
  • Durling, Richard. A Dictionary of Medical Terms. Leiden: Brill, 1993.
  • Edelstein, Ludwig. Ancient Medicine. Baltimore, MD: Johns Hopkins University Press, 1967.
  • Farrington, B. Greek Science: Theophrastus to Galen. Baltimore, MD: Penguin, 1953.
  • Fischer, Klaus-Dietrich ed., Text and Tradition: Studies in Ancient Greek Medicine and its Transmission: Presented to Jutta Kollesch Leiden: Brill, 1998.
  • Frede, Michael. "The Empiricist Attitude toward Reason and Theory" Apeiron. 21 (1988): 79-97.
  • Freudiger, Jurg. "Methodus resolutiva: Antikes und Neuzeitliches in Jacopo Acontios Methodenschrift" Freiburger Zeitschrift für Philosophie und Theologie. 45.3 (1998): 407-446.
  • Gill, Christopher. "Galen vs. Chrysippus on the Tripartite Psyche in 'Timaeus' 69-72" in Interpreting the 'Timaeus-Critias. Tomas Calvo ed. Sankt Augustin: Academia: 1997.
  • Gill, Christopher. "Did Chrysippus Understand Medea?" Phronesis. 28.2 (1983): 136-149.
  • Hankinson, R. J. "Actions and Passions" in Passions and Perceptions. Martha Nussbaum, ed. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1993.
  • Hankinson, R.J. The Cambridge Companion to Galen. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2008.
  • Hankinson, R. J. "Galen's Anatomy of the Soul" Phronesis 36.3 (1991): 197-233.
  • Hankinson, R. J. "A Purely Verbal Dispute? Galen on Stoic and Academic Epistemology" Revue Internationale de Philosophie. 45.178 (1991): 267-300.
  • Hankinson, R. J. "Evidence, Externality and Antecendence: Inquiries Into Later Greek Causal Concepts." Phronesis 32.1 (1987): 80-100.
  • Hankinson, R. J. "Causes and Empiricism: A Problem in the Interpretation of Later Greek Medical Method." Phronesis 32.4 (1987): 329-348.
  • Kagan, Jerome, Nancy Snidman, Doreen Ardus, J. Steven Rezinck. Galen's Prophecy: Temperament in Human Nature. NY: Basic Books, 1994.
  • Kember, O. "Right and Left in the Sexual Theories of Parmenides" Journal of Hellenic Studies. 91 (1971): 70-79.
  • Kidd, I. G. "Posidonius on Emotions" in Problems in Stoicism. A. A. Long, ed. London: Athlone, 1971.
  • Kollesch, Jutta. Galen über das Riechorgan. Berlin: Akademie-Verlag, 1964.
  • Kollesch, Jutta and Diethard Nickel, eds. Galen und das hellenistische Erbe. Stuttgart: Franz Steiner, 1993.
  • Kudlien, Fridolf and Richard J. Durling. Galen's Method of Healing. Leiden: E.J. Brill, 1991.
  • Lloyd, G.E.R. Methods and Problems in Greek Science. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1991.
  • Lloyd, G.E.R. Greek Science After Aristotle. New York: Norton, 1973.
  • Lloyd, G.E.R. "Parmenides' Sexual Theories: A Reply to MER Kember" Journal of Hellenic Studies. 92 (1972): 178-179.
  • Lumpe, Adolf. "Der logische Grundgedanke der vierten Schlussfigur." Prima Philosophia. 11.4 (1998): 397-404.
  • Lumpe, Adolf. "Zur Anordnung der Pramissen des kategorischen Syllogismus bei Albinos, Galenus und Pseudo-Apuleius" Prima Philosophia 8.2 (1995): 115-124.
  • Mansfield, Jaap. "The Idea of the Will in Chrysippus, Posidonius, and Galen" Proceedings of the Boston Area Colloquium in Ancient Philosophy 7 (1991): 107-145.
  • Manuli, Paola. "Galien et le Stoicisme" Revue de Mataphysique et de Morale 97.3 (1992): 365-375.
  • Mowry, Bryan. "From Galen's Theory to William Harvey's Theory: A Case Study in the Rationality of Scientific Theory Change" Studies in History and the Philosophy of Science 16 (1985): 49-82.
  • Nutton, Vivian. Ancient Medicine. London: Routledge, 2004.
  • Nutton, Vivian. "The Chronology of Galen's Early Career" Classical Quarterly 23 (1973): 158-171.
  • Nutton, Vivian. (ed.) Galen: Problems and Prospects. London: Wellcome Institute, 1981.
  • Nutton, Vivian. "Galen ad multos annos" Dynamis 15 (1995): 25-39.
  • Rescher, Nicholas. Galen and the Syllogism: An Examination of the Thesis that Galen Originated the Fourth Figure of the Syllogism in Light of New Data from the Arabic. Pittsburgh, PA: University of Pittsburgh Press, 1996.
  • Sarton, George. Galen of Pergamon. Lawrence, KS: University of Kansas Press, 1954.
  • Siegel, Rudolph. Galen's System of Physiology and Medicine. Basel: Karger, 1968.
  • Smith, Wesley. The Hippocratic Tradition. Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press, 1979.
  • Temkin, Owsei. Galenism: The Rise and Decline of a Medical Philosophy. Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press, 1973.
  • Tieleman, Teun. "Plotinus on the Seat of the Soul: Reverberations of Galen and Alexander in Enn. IV, 3 27ESS, 23." Phronesis. 43.4 (1998): 306-325.

Select Proceedings of Conferences on Galen

1981 English

  • Nutton, Vivian, Galen : Problems and Prospects. London: Wellcome Institute for the History of Medicine, 1981.

1982 English

  • Kudlien, F., & Durling, R. J. Galen's method of healing : Proceedings of the 1982 Galen Symposium. Paper presented at the Galen Symposium (1982 : Christian-Albrechts Universität); Studies in Ancient Medicine,; v. 1, 205. Leiden: Brill, 1991.

1986 3rd Italian

  • Manuli, P., & Vegretti, M. (1988). Le Opere Psicologiche di Galeno : Atti del terzo Colloquio Galenico Internazionale, Pavia, 10-12 Settembre 1986. Paper presented at the Colloqio Galenico Internazionale (3d : 1986 : Pavia, Italy); Elenchos (Bibliopolis (Firm)) 13,

1989 4th German

  • Kollesch, J., Nickel, D., Humboldt-Universität zu Berlin, & Institut für Geschichte der Medizin. (1993). Galen und das Hellenistische Erbe : Verhandlungen des IV. Internationalen Galen-Symposiums veranstaltet vom Institut für Geschichte der Medizin am Bereich Medizin (charité) der Humboldt-Universität zu Berlin 18.-20. September 1989. Paper presented at the Galen Symposium (4th : 1989 : Humboldt-Universität Zu Berlin); Sudhoffs Archiv.; Beihefte,; Heft 32,

1995 5th English

  • Debru, A. (1997). Galen on Pharmacology : Philosophy, history, and medicine : Proceedings of the Vth International Galen Colloquium, Lille, 16-18 March 1995. Paper presented at the International Galen Colloquium (5th : 1995 : Lille, France); Studies in Ancient Medicine,; v. 16, 336. Leiden: Brill, 2007.

1988 Spanish

  • López Férez, J. A. (1991). Galeno, obra, pensamiento e influencia : Coloquio internacional celebrado en Madrid, 22-25 de marzo de 1988. Madrid : Universidad Nacional de Educación a Distancia, 1991.

2002 Italian

  • Garofalo, I., Roselli, A., Fischer, K., Galen, On the therapeutic method, & Book III. (2003). Galenismo e Medicina Tardoantica : Fonti greche, latine e arabe : Atti del Seminario Internazionale di Siena, Certosa di Pontignano, 9 e 10 Settembre 2002. Paper presented at the Annali Dell'Istituto Universitario Orientale Di Napoli.; Sezione Filologico-Letteraria.; Quaderni,; 7,

2002 English

  • Nutton, Vivian. The Unknown Galen. London : Institute of Classical Studies, School of Advanced Study, University of London, 2002.

Author Information

Michael Boylan
Marymount University
U. S. A.

Ge Hong (Ko Hung, 283—343 C.E.)

Ge_HongGe Hong was an eclectic philosopher who dedicated his life to searching for physical immortality, which he thought was attainable through alchemy. He lived during China's tumultuous Period of Disunity (220-589 C.E.), a time in which alien conqueror regimes ruled northern China, the cradle of Chinese civilization, while a series of weak, transplanted Chinese states occupied recently colonized southern China. These political conditions, along with the social chaos they engendered, no doubt gave rise to Ge Hong's ardent desire to establish order and permanency in both his spiritual and secular worlds. His most important contribution to Chinese philosophy was his attempt to reconcile an immortality-centered Daoism with Confucianism. Equally important, to establish political order, he also tried to reconcile Legalism with Confucianism. His penetrating insight was that the teachings of no one school could solve the problems that his world faced – only a combination of the best methods of each could do so.

Table of Contents

  1. The Life of Ge Hong
  2. Immortality
  3. Reconciliation of Daoism and Confucianism
  4. Confucianism and Legalism
  5. The Importance of Broad Knowledge
  6. Conclusion
  7. References and Further Reading

1. The Life of Ge Hong

In 283 C.E., Ge Hong was born into a southern magnate family whose native place was the Jurong district in Danyang prefecture, which was near Nanjing, in the southwest corner of present day Jiangsu province. Both his grandfather and father had reputations for broad learning and served as high ministers for the Wu state, which ruled over southeastern China from 220-280. Ge's father continued to hold a number of middle level positions under the Western Jin dynasty (265-317) that briefly reunited China. Upon his father's death in 296, Ge endured a period of relative poverty and lost his family's extensive library due to civil strife. To educate himself, from this time on, he started copying books and reading voraciously. He began with the Confucian classics, but soon turned his attention to the various philosophical writings. Under the tutelage of Zheng Yin, who was both a Confucian classicist and a Daoist adept, Ge began his studies of the immortality arts. Zheng Yin himself was a disciple of Ge's uncle, Ge Xuan (164-244), a Daoist adept who was reputed to have become an immortal.

Like other southern gentry, Ge Hong's early career was spent in military positions. He had an extensive knowledge of martial affairs and was trained in the use of arms. In 303, at the age of twenty, he was called upon to organize and lead a militia in his native place against a rebel army, which he handily defeated. In a rare admission of violence for a Chinese literatus, he even relates that, with bow and arrow, two men and a horse died at his hands. In 305, after being promoted to the rank of a General Who Makes the Waves Submit, Ge tried to make his way to Luoyang, the capital. Although his autobiography tells us he did so "to look for unusual books," he was probably also hoping to obtain a promotion. However, due to the Rebellion of the Eight Princes that was being fought throughout northern China, he never made it; instead, he wandered throughout southern China. To escape from the turmoil that was embroiling the rest of China, he finally accepted a position as a military councilor under his friend who was appointed to be the governor of Guangzhou (Canton), a port city in the far south.

After his patron was killed enroute to assuming the governorship, Ge refused many other military appointments and remained in Guangzhou for the next eight years, living the life of a recluse at nearby Mount Luofu. In 314, he returned to his native place of Jurong. There, he studied under another Daoist adept named Bao Qing (260-330), the former governor of Nanhai prefecture, who was so impressed that he gave Ge his eldest daughter in marriage. It was during this long period of reclusion that Ge wrote his two part magnum opus whose title bore his sobriquet: the Inner Chapters of the Master Who Embraces Simplicity and the Outer Chapters of the Master Who Embraces Simplicity. Ge used the Daoist Inner Chapters to substantiate the reality of immortality and convey the methods for realizing it, while the Confucian Outer Chapters describe the problems afflicting the secular world and his proposed solutions. In fact, until the fourteenth century, the Inner Chapters and Outer Chapters circulated independently from each other. With these two works, Ge aspired to establish his own school of philosophy. Also at this time, illustrative of his aspirations, Ge compiled hagiographical works entitled Biographies of Divine Transcedents and Biographies of Recluses.

With the establishment of the Eastern Jin dynasty in southern China in 317, the transplanted throne was eager to gain the allegiance of powerful southern gentry families; thus, men such as Ge Hong were showered with official appointments, which were usually more honorary than substantive in nature. In recognition of his past military successes, Ge himself was given the title of Marquis of the Region Within the Pass. Finally, in 326, Wang Dao (276-339), the prime minister, appointed him to a series of positions, ending with that of military advisor. By 332, due to his advanced age (he was 50) and desire to find ingredients for immortality elixirs, he begged to be given a post in northern part of present-day Vietnam. On his way there, the governor of Guangzhou, Deng Yue, detained him there indefinitely. He thus took up residence at nearby Mount Luofu where he engaged in immortality practices until his death in 343.

By his own admission, Ge Hong was a man that was out of sorts with his age. He was a southerner in an age where only northern émigrés were given posts of substance. Due to his lack of verbal eloquence, he could never obtain social prestige in the salons where men were prized for their ability to engage in "Pure Talk" - abstract philosophical discussions. Nor did his strong Confucian sense of morality sit well with the libertine tendencies of that prevailed among the northern émigrés. The outlet of his frustrations became his writings, in which he attacked the fashions and trends of his day and proposed his own vision of how people should obtain stability in an instable world.

2. Immortality

Ge Hong wholeheartedly believed that anyone, through unrelenting effort and study, could obtain immortality. One does not have to be either rich or powerful to do so; in fact, wealth and position are harmful because they inhibit one from attaining the necessary moral and physical serenity. Moreover, it is not up to the arbitrary decisions of deities to extend our lives - they are merely divine administrators who keep track of our sins and good deeds; consequently, sacrifices and prayers to them for this purpose are useless. Thus, whether one can obtain immortality is entirely based on his or her own diligence and determination. It was precisely for those educated people who wanted and were willing to work towards obtaining immortality that Ge wrote his Inner Chapters. The overriding importance that he attached to obtaining eternal life is evident in that the inner, and thereby his most important, chapters of his magnum opus were dedicated to the topic.

Ge Hong firmly believed that physical immortality was possible. This is because all things are permeated by the metaphysical oneness, xuan (the mystery), which creates and animates all things. Significantly, for Ge, xuan is synonymous with the words dao (the way, the ultimate reality) and yi (the one, the unity). In this light, he describes xuan in the following manner: it "carries within it the embryo of the Original One, it forms and shapes the two Principles (Yin and Yang); it exhales and absorbs the great Genesis, it inspires and transforms the multitude of species, it makes constellations go round, it shaped the primordial Darkness, it guides the wonderful mainspring of the universe, it exhales the four seasons … if one adds to it, it does not increase. If one takes away from it, it does not grow less. If something is given to it, it is not increased in glory. If something is taken from it, it does not suffer. Where the Mystery is present, joy is infinite; where the Mystery has departed, efficacy is exhausted and the spirit disappears" (Robinet, 82-83). In other words, the key to immortality is maintaining this everlasting oneness within oneself - if one cannot do so, he or she will soon die. The reason why people lose it is that they become attached through their desires to the outside world, thereby forgetting the jewel that resides within. As Ge put it, "The way of xuan is obtained within oneself, but is lost due to things outside oneself. Those who employ xuan are gods; those who forget it are merely [empty] vessels."

How does one maintain the unity within oneself? For Ge Hong it had much to do with preserving, enhancing, and refining one's qi, which for him embodied the metaphysical mystery. Qi, which originally meant "breath" or "vapor," came to designate the vital energy that exists within and animates all things. As Ge Hong relates, "people reside within qi and qi resides within people. From heaven and earth down to the ten thousand things, each one requires qi to live. As for those who excel at circulating their qi, internally they are able to nourish their body; externally, they are able to repel illnesses." Since each person receives a finite amount of qi at birth, he recommends various methods to retain and enhance it, which include breathing exercises, sexual techniques, calisthenics, dietary restrictions, and the ingestion of herbal medicines. Since none of these methods is infallible, he recommends that an adept should practice a number of them in combination with each other. By doing so, one protects oneself from manifold disasters, such as illnesses, demons, savage beasts and weapons, while also lessening desires, transforming the body, and extending one's lifespan. These methods could even give their practitioners supernatural powers, such as curing illnesses, raising the dead, seeing the future, commanding gods and ghosts, forgoing food for years, and the ability to disappear.

Nevertheless, none of these techniques could permanently keep xuan within oneself. To do that, nothing was comparable with taking alchemically created medicines. Ge thus informs us that, "Even if one performs breathing exercises and calisthenics, as well as ingests herbal medicines, this can only extend the years of your lifespan, but it will not save you from death. Ingesting divine cinnabar will make your lifespan inexhaustible. You will last as long as heaven and earth, be able to travel on clouds and ride dragons, and ascend at will to the Heaven of Highest Clarity." Alchemically derived medicines, the best of which contained either liquefied gold or reverted cinnabar, were able to have this marvelous effect because the substances from which they were made had shown themselves, through repeated firings in the alchemist's stove, to be impervious to decay or dissolution. According to Ge, "As for forging of gold and cinnabar, the longer one burns them, the more marvelous their transformations. When gold enters the flames, even after one hundred firings, it will not disappear. If you bury it forever, it will never decay. If one ingests these two substances, they will refine that person's body, and make it so that he or she will neither age nor die." In other words, one makes one's own body imperishable by ingesting imperishable things. Mechanically what happens is that, upon ingestion, these substances seep into one's blood and qi, thereby making them stronger. Ge Hong calls this using an outside substance to fortify one's self. The reason why herbs are inferior to gold and cinnabar is that they are perishable; thus, they lack the capacity to make the body imperishable. Unfortunately though, the ingredients for making these mineral medicines are difficult to obtain, the process of smelting them is arduous, and the ritual circumstances under which they must be made are elaborate; as a result, Ge Hong several times admits that he has never had enough resources to attempt to produce these superb formulas.

3.Reconciliation of Daoism and Confucianism

It is often said of premodern Chinese literati that they were Daoist at home while Confucian in the office. Ge Hong was in fact probably one of the first Chinese thinkers to consciously try to reconcile Confucianism and Daoism. As the division of his major work into inner and outer chapters indicates, he did so by asserting that Confucianism and Daoism addressed different aspects of life. Confucianism addressed the external world and provided means by which to ameliorate its many problems; Daoism concerned the inner world and provided means by which to attain immortality. As Ge succinctly put it, "For an extraordinarily talented person, what difficulty could there be in practicing both (Confucianism and Daoism) at the same time? Inwardly, such people treasure the way of nourishing life; outwardly, they exhibit their brilliance in the world. If they regulate their persons, their persons then will be cultivated for a prolonged time; if they rule the country, the country will achieve the state of great peace." Cultivating one's spirit for immortality thereby automatically enables one to rule a country well. Thus, if one becomes a terrestrial immortal, Ge Hong sees no reason why such a person cannot hold office and contribute to the welfare of his generation.

Nevertheless, even though both were important, Daoism was even more so. That is because in the far past the sage kings followed the Dao "the oneness" or "the natural order of things," as a result, the people's conduct was flawless and natural processes transpired smoothly without disruption or disaster. Later kings, however, no longer followed the Dao; consequently, natural disasters occurred frequently and people became evil and unruly. It was only at this point that Confucianism was introduced in an attempt to rectify this situation. Thus, Daoism is superior because it kept the world from becoming chaotic; Confucianim, on the other hand, only appeared when the world declined into disorder and its practitioners have often become entangled in the resulting mess. Thus, Daoists, like Confucians, provide the world with moral order, but they do so without becoming soiled in the process. As Ge Hong put it, "In regard to the Daoists, their making consists of excelling in cultivating the self to complete their duties; their repose consists in excelling in doing away with the impurities of people; their governance consists of excelling in cutting off misfortune before it occurs; their giving consists in excelling at saving things, but not considering it virtuous; their activity consist in excelling at using their heart-mind to urge the people [to do good]; their quiescence consists in excelling at being cautious and without rancor. These characteristics are why Daoism is the ruler and leader of the hundred schools of philosophy and why it is the ancestor of [Confucian] righteous and benevolence." Nevertheless, since only a few people are able to correctly pursue Daoism and present times are disordered, Confucianism is necessary to maintain the social order that is embodied in the family and the state. Very much in a Confucian vein, he evaluates both philosophies through a moral lenses.

One of the ways in which Ge Hong connected Confucianism and Daoism is by stating that one needed to perfect oneself ethically to pursue immortality. In his Inner Chapters, Ge Hong makes it clear that none of the methods for prolonging one's life will work unless one is morally pure, which can only happen by realizing Confucian virtues. Ge explicitly states that, "those who seek to become immortals must regard loyalty, filiality, peacefulness, obedience, benevolence and trustworthiness as fundamental. If one does not cultivate his or her moral behavior, and merely instead devotes oneself to esoteric methods, he or she will never obtain an extended lifespan." Since these virtues, particularly that of benevolence (ren), emphasize putting the interests of others before one's own, they cultivated a sense of selflessness and detachment that Ge viewed as essential for maintaining the mysterious oneness within oneself.

His strong emphasis on morality led him to systematize and quantify earlier ideas about how spirits punished immoral behavior. Ge Hong maintained that for each minor moral transgression one committed, the Director of Fates would subtract three days from his or her lifespan; for each major transgression, three hundred days would be deducted. To guide people's behavior, he even listed sixty-four possible sins. Very few of these prohibitions are religious in nature - the overwhelming majority concern secular life and many are Confucian inspired. Furthermore, he posited that, to achieve spiritual benefits, one had to continuously accumulate good deeds: 300 were needed to become an earthbound immortal and 1200 to become a celestial immortal. One mishap and the balance would be canceled. Ge Hong even transformed the three corpses, evil entities within the body who endeavor to destroy it to earn their freedom, into ethical agents that try to decimate their host's health by disclosing his sins to the celestial authorities. This system of measuring good and bad deeds would later giver rise to the Ledgers of Merit and Demerit, popular books that let people keep track of their moral progress by assigning numerical scores to virtuous and immoral behavior.

Ge Hong also attempted to reconcile Daoism with Confucianism by both emphasizing the importance and naturalness of hierarchy and attacking Daoism's equalitarian tendencies. Although Laozi and Zhuangzi always assumed that kings would exist, their utopian vision of society was a small village society whose inhabitants never leave their hamlets, do not use contrivances, and have few material goods. In order to attack this line of thinking in his Outer Chapters, Ge Hong puts forth the views of a man named Bao Jingyan who extended the Daoist arguments to their logical conclusion. Bao maintains that the simple agrarian utopias in which people lived simply and equally were lost due to the creation of hierarchy, which was based on the strong oppressing the weak and the smart deceiving the foolish. With the lord/subject tie came a host of evils such as weapons, armies, rebellions, greed, thievery, deceit, extravagance, and crime. Thus, Bao advocated the abolishment of rulers as the key to securing peace and happiness. Incidentally, Bao is the earliest known Chinese advocate of anarchy. Ge Hong, on the contrary, thinks that in a state of nature people think only of their own desires, hence they vie with each other like beasts for scarce resources. Hierarchy was thus established to put an end to the strong oppressing the weak. Moreover, hierarchy is natural: as the oneness unfolds into the ten thousand things, it divides itself into high and low; hence, heaven is above and earth is below. Thus, it is only natural that some people are more important than others. This is true to the extent that even immortals are hierarchically organized: freshly minted immortals must occupy the lower rungs of the celestial bureaucracy and serve their superiors, while terrestrial immortals are inferior to their celestial counterparts. Ge also recognized that civilization could not be undone and that hierarchy had brought about material progress, as the following passage indicates: "Now, [would you be at ease] if I made you reside in the cramped quarters of a nest or cave? [Would you be at ease] if upon your death, your body was abandoned in the fields? [Would you be at ease] if upon being impeded by a river, you had to swim to cross it? [Would you be at ease] if upon traveling through the mountains, you had to walk and shoulder luggage? [Would you be at ease] if your cooking implements were cast away and you had to make do with raw and smelly food? [Would you be at ease] if you no longer had stone needles for acupuncture and had to merely rely on nature to [cure] your illness? [Would you be at ease] if nakedness was your only ornament and you had no clothes? [Would you be at ease] if you came across a female and made her your mate without an intermediary? You and I would both likely say, 'to do these things would be impossible.' How much less could we do without a lord!" In other words, progress and hierarchy are realities, and beneficial ones at that, which can neither be ignored nor abandoned.

4. Confucianism and Legalism

Since Ge Hong recognized that this world cannot be ignored, he believed that one must find a way to improve it. Given the corruption and chaos that ruled his age, like many of his contemporaries, he looked for answers beyond Confucianism to its arch nemesis, Legalism. His reform program was thus a synthesis of both Confucian and Legalist political ideas. First of all, even though he believed that the ruler, like a good Confucian sovereign, should cultivate his person, lead the people through his own moral example, and take their welfare as his overriding concern, he admitted that this was not sufficient to guide society. To govern well, one had to have clear laws to punish miscreants. He warns us that, "It is not that governing with benevolence is not wonderful, it is just that the black-haired masses can be crafty and deceitful. They hanker after profit and forget righteousness. If one does not order them with one's authority and correct them with punishments, if one only admires the ways of Fuxi and Shennong (Confucian cultural heroes), then chaos cannot be avoided and the resulting calamities will be numerous. [Yet] to use killing to stop killing, how could anyone find joy in that?" In short, although leading through one's moral example is preferable, it is not realistic: it is sometimes necessary to use the harsher methods. Since Confucian moral example was not enough, the ruler must turn to the law and mete out punishments. Following Legalist ideas, Ge argues that the laws must be clear, explicit, and fair; i.e., they must be applicable to everyone. Moreover, the punishments for misbehavior must be severe. It is precisely generous rewards and harsh punishments that will keep the strong from oppressing the weak. Regimes are weak because their laws are neither severe nor enforced. In line with this thinking, Ge was in favor of reviving punishments that mutilated the guilty. Convicts suffering from such punishments would be constant reminders to the people of the terrible price to be paid for violating the law. Lest the modern reader judge Ge harshly for supporting such draconian measures, since the death penalty largely replaced the mutilation punishments, Ge thought the latter was more humane, since at least the criminal would escape with his or her life.

Another way in which Ge Hong tried to reconcile Confucianism and Legalism was through the type of training officials should receive. Under the Legalist Qin dynasty (221-207 BCE), which unified China for the first time, officials were largely men who excelled in legal and administrative matters. During the Han dynasty (206 BCE - 220 CE), particularly during its latter half, Confucianism gradually became the dominant ideology, hence the education and knowledge of officials became more centered on the Confucian classics. Men who primarily specialized in legal matters were slighted and only given clerical positions. Due to this situation, Ge complained that officials, no matter what their level, no longer understood the laws, hence they often issued incorrect judgments and were deceived by their more legally savvy underlings. Consequently, he thought that aspirants to officialdom should be tested not only on the Confucian classics, but also on the law.

5. The Importance of Broad Knowledge

That officials should be knowledgeable in both the classics and the law highlights one of his most consistent teachings: a person must be broadly educated and that deep study leads to the mastery of all things. For Ge Hong, through the diligent acquisition of knowledge, anything was possible, whether it be ruling a country or attaining immortality. In this vein, he said, "When one peels away dark clouds, one exposes the sun; as a result, the ten thousand things cannot hide their shapes. By unrolling bamboo and silk (that is, by reading books) and investigating the past and present, heaven and earth thereby hide none of their facts. How much less so gods and demons? And how much less so the affairs of people?" Nevertheless, one could not just specialize in one kind of learning, but had to learn the teachings of many different schools. Likewise, in seeking immortality, one should study many techniques and never merely practice one exclusively. Similarly, in terms of book learning, one should not merely confine oneself to learning the classics because all written works had something of worth. Indeed, he propounded the revolutionary sentiment that the elaborate writings of his day were superior to the simplistic classics. The more widely one read, and the more techniques one acquired, the more one would be likely to excel in both the spiritual and secular worlds. Study was also a means of self-cultivation - through it one could eliminate desires by becoming indifferent to his or her physical circumstances.

According to Ge Hong, one of the primary reasons governance of his time was so inept and ineffective was that officials were not selected on the basis of their intelligence, but only due to their connections, bribery, or their ability to speak eloquently. Ge thought the solution to this problem would be to use examinations to select men on the basis of their knowledge of the classics and administrative matters. The examinations should be held in the palace, supervised by high officials, and their contents should be kept in the utmost secrecy. By this means, there would be little opportunity to pass the examinations through deceit or bribery. Moreover, when the only way to become an official is through examinations, everyone will value study. Although he admitted that passing the examinations would not guarantee that that person would be a good official, he thought that the ability to do so was a fair indicator of talent. In other words, Ge Hong was one of the earliest proponents of selecting officials through a vigorous and fair examination system, one of the hallmarks of Chinese civilization.

6. Conclusion

In sum, Ge Hong was a philosopher who, due to the topsy-turvy world in which he lived, was willing to look for solutions in the wisdom of any philosopher, regardless of his sectarian background. With Ge's overriding sense of the importance of morality and his overwhelming urge for permanency in the form of immortality, he reconciled Confucian and Daoism by saying that both were trying to improve the condition of mankind and that practicing Confucian virtues was necessary for attaining immortality. Likewise, this search for concrete, no-nonsense answers also led him to reconcile his Confucian leanings with the real politick teachings of Legalism. Thus, although he maintained that the ruler must endeavor to mold his people's behavior through his own example, generous rewards and severe punishments were even more important in regulating the affairs of the troublesome masses. In order to manifest both these philosophies, Ge advocated that officials be both experts in the classics and legal matters. Thus, Ge helped fashion the values that allowed latter Chinese to unproblematically simultaneously use Daoist, Confucian, and Legalist assumptions in both their public and private lives.

7. References and Further Reading

  • Balazs, Etienne. Chinese Civilization and Bureaucracy. New Haven: Yale University Press, 1964.
    • Besides giving a valuable introduction to the tumultuous intellectual and social milieu in which Ge Hong lived, this work also translates part of the chapter from his Outer Chapters in which Ge Hong critiques the anarchist Bao Jingyan.
  • Campany, Robert Ford. To Live as Long as Heaven and Earth: A Translation and Study of Ge Hong's Traditions of Divine Transcendents. Berkeley: University of California Press, 2002.
    • This fine translation of Ge Hong's biographies of immortals has an introduction that insightfully describes his religious ideas.
  • Lai Chi-Tim, "Ko Hung's Discourse of Hsien-Immortality: A Daoist Configuration of an Alternate Ideal Self-Identity," Numen 45 (1998): 183-220.
    • Although somewhat turgid, this article successfully delineates the novel aspects of Ge Hong's views on immortality and situates his religious beliefs within the social and political context in which they were formed.
  • Robinet, Isabelle. Daoism: Growth of a Religion, translated by Phyllis Brooks. Stanford: Stanford University Press, 1997.
    • Robinet devotes an entire chapter of this work to Ge Hong and masterfully contextualizes his thought within the Daoist religious tradition.
  • Sailey, Jay. The Master Who Embraces Simplicity: A Study of the Philosopher Ko Hung, A.D. 283-343. San Francisco: Chinese Materials Center, Inc., 1978.
    • The author translates twenty-one chapters of Ge Hong's Outer Chapters. He also deftly summarizes Ge Hong's ideas as seen in this work.
  • Sivin, Nathan. "On the Pao P'u Tzu Nei Pien and the Life of Ko Hong (283-343)," Isis 60 (1976): 388-391.
    • In this short article, Sivin makes some important points about the circulation of his works and the length of his life.
  • Sivin, Nathan. "On the Word 'Daoist' as a Source of Perplexity." History of Religions 17 (1978): 303-330.
    • This intellectually penetrating article challenges the idea that Ge Hong was a Daoist at all, in the sense that he was not at all connected with organized Daoist religion.
  • Ware, James R. Alchemy, Medicine & Religion in the China of A.D. 320: The Nei P'ien of Ko Hung. Rpt; New York: Dover Publications, Inc., 1981.
    • Originally published in 1966, this work is a complete translation of Ge Hong's The Inner Chapters. The reader must beware, though, since the text is inaccurately translated through Judeo-Christian lenses.
  • Yu, David C. History of Chinese Daoism: Volume 1. Lanham: University Press of America, 2000.
    • This overview of the history of Daoism devotes a lengthy chapter to Ge Hong with extensive quotations to his views on immortality.

Author Information

Keith Knapp
The Citadel
U. S. A.

Ignacio Ellacuría (1930—1989)

Ignacio Ellacuría, a naturalized citizen of El Salvador, was born in Spain in 1930. He joined the Jesuits in 1947 and was quickly sent to El Salvador, where he lived and worked for the next forty-two years, except for periods when he was pursuing his education in Ecuador, Spain, and West Germany. He developed an important and novel contribution to Latin American Liberation Philosophy. The body of thought known as Liberation Philosophy developed in Latin America in the second half of the Twentieth Century. It grew out of the works of philosophers working in Peru (A. Salazar Bondy) and Mexico (Leopoldo Zea), and quickly spread throughout Latin America. It resulted from efforts by these philosophers to create a Latin American philosophy by looking at how the discipline could help to make sense of Latin American reality. That reality, as distinct from the European (and later North American) context in which the modern Western philosophical tradition developed, is one of dependence on economic and political (and to some extent cultural) factors that are beyond one’s control. In thematizing dependency, Latin American philosophy developed a liberation philosophy that focused on the social and personal imperative to overcome dependency as the path toward the fullness of one’s humanity, given the conditions of dependency. There are at least five different schools within Latin American liberation philosophy (see Cerutti in the Bibliography below), but all are grounded in the attempt to use philosophy to understand the Latin American reality of dependency and the need to overcome it.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Ellacuría’s Philosophy of Liberation
  3. References and Further Reading

1. Life

Ellacuría's initial training in philosophy was in the Neo-Scholasticism required at that time of all Jesuits. Later he studied Ortega, Bergson, Heidegger, phenomenology, and the existentialists. All of these influenced him, but the key influences in the make up of his mature philosophical thought were Hegel, Marx, and the Basque philosopher Xavier Zubiri (1898-1983). Ellacuría worked on his doctorate under Zubiri from 1962 to 1965, writing a dissertation that reached some 1100 pages on the concept of essence in Zubiri's thought. He also studied theology with the great Heideggerian Jesuit, Karl Rahner, and had finished all the requirements for a second PhD, but did not write the dissertation (which he was also going to write under Zubiri). For the next 18 years, until Zubiri's death in 1983, they were close collaborators, with Ellacuría returning to Spain from El Salvador for a few months each year to facilitate their work. The two worked together on most of Zubiri's texts and talks, eventually reaching the point where Zubiri would not publish something, or even present a lecture, without first showing the material to Ellacuría.

Zubiri is a major figure in 20th century Spanish philosophy and has had a lot of influence in Latin America, largely through the efforts of Ellacuría, but his work is not well known in the countries more traditionally associated with Continental Philosophy (France and Germany) or in the Anglo-American tradition. By the age of 23, Zubiri had finished both a PhD in theology at the Gregorian University and a PhD in philosophy at the University of Madrid. At 28 he was named to the prestigious chair in the history of philosophy at the University of Madrid, and for the next few years he traveled widely in Europe to study with experts in many different fields: philosophy with Husserl and Heidegger, physics with Schrödinger and De Broglie, as well as biology and mathematics with luminaries of the day. Zubiri also taught in Paris at the Institut Catholique and at the University of Barcelona, but in 1942 he left formal academia and for the rest of his life conducted seminars on his own.

From among a large number of very important publications, his two most important are On Essence (1963) and the three-volume work, Sentient Intelligence (1980-83). Ellacuría, who knew all of Zubiri's work, was particularly familiar with these two works: his doctoral dissertation was on the former, and he worked very closely with Zubiri to bring the latter to publication before Zubiri's death.

Zubiri created a systematic philosophy grounded in a re-configuring and overcoming of the distinction between epistemology and metaphysics, between the knower and the known (for more, see the section below on Ellacuría's philosophy). There are now various interpretations of Zubiri's work (among others, phenomenological, Nietzschean, praxical) with Ellacuría heading up the historical/metaphysical interpretation. Although there is no agreement among Zubirian scholars as to which among these is the better interpretation, the fact that Zubiri adopted Ellacuría as his closest collaborator for the last 20 years of his life has to lend some weight to Ellacuría's interpretation

Ellacuría was murdered in 1989 - along with five other Jesuits with whom he lived, their housekeeper and her daughter – at the hands of an elite, US-trained squadron of the Salvadoran army. The murders came towards the end of El Salvador's long civil war (1980-1992) between a right-wing government and leftist guerillas. At the time of his death, Ellacuría was president of the country's prestigious Jesuit university, the University of Central America (UCA), as well as chair of its philosophy department and editor of many of its scholarly publications. In his quarter century with the UCA, the last ten years as its president, he had played a principle role in molding it into a university whose full institutional power - that is, through its research, teaching and publications - was directed towards uncovering the causes of poverty and oppression in El Salvador. In addition, he spoke out frequently on these topics as a regular contributor to the country's newspapers, radio and television programs. He also addressed these topics frequently in his scholarly publications on philosophy and theology. These were the reasons behind his murder.

During his lifetime Ellacuría was known, primarily, as one of the principle contributors to Latin American liberation theology. However, he also spent the last two decades of his life elaborating a liberation philosophy. The latter work was left, at the time of his murder, unfinished, unpublished, and scattered across many different writings. In the years since his death, a number of scholars have pieced together his philosophical thought, and it is now possible to argue that Ellacuría had a well-developed philosophy that represents an important contribution to Latin American liberation philosophy.

2. Ellacuría's Philosophy of Liberation

Ellacuría argued that philosophy, in order to remain true to itself, must be a philosophy of liberation. He begins with the assertion that it is the responsibility of philosophy to help us in figuring out what reality is and in situating ourselves within reality. For Ellacuría, human reality is historical and social: the range of possibilities in which the freedom of any given individual's life must be exercised is the result of both past human actions and the society in which the individual lives. Human actions accrete as history, and within this reality individuals and societies are able to realize some of the possibilities handed over by the past, in the process creating new possibilities to hand over to future generations. There is progress in reality, from the physical to the biological to the praxical, each of these representing a further unfolding of an ever more complex reality. In the realm of praxis (his word for human action to change reality), human beings act to realize a wider range of possibility: praxis seeks to realize a fuller praxis. Thus, praxis realizes a gradual increase in liberty: praxis gradually liberates liberty.

Human beings, as praxical beings, are responsible for the further unfolding of reality, i.e., for the realization of a reality in which all praxical beings can fully realize themselves as such. Ellacuría argues that the vantage point from which one can see most clearly what reality unfolding as history has and has not delivered, is the perspective of the marginalized. Thus, the philosophy of history must make a preferential option for the marginalized, i.e., it must be a philosophy of liberation.

Ellacuría's liberation philosophy begins with a critique grounded in a Zubirian metaphysics that is radically critical of all forms of idealism, including most of what has passed for realism in the history of Western philosophy. This critique argues that the Western tradition made a fundamental error, from Parmenides on, in separating sensation and the intellect, an error which distorted all subsequent philosophy. This error resulted in the "logification of intelligence" and the “entification of reality.” By the former, Zubiri means that the full powers of the intellect have been reduced to a predicative logos, i.e., a logos whose function is to determine what things are, in themselves and in relation to other things. Zubiri argues that while this is a vital part of intelligence, it is not the only part and not the most fundamental part, but Western philosophy reduced intelligence to this predicative logos. In doing so, the object of logos, i.e., the being of entities, became the sum total of reality: reality became entified. These two distortions (the logification of intelligence and entification of reality) can only be overcome by the recognition that sensation and intellection are not separate, that they are two aspects of a single faculty. Zubiri called this faculty the sentient intellect. By this term he meant that, for human beings, the intellect is always sentient and sensation is always intelligent. The two faculties of sensation and intelligence are, for human beings, one and the same faculty. This new, human faculty, the "sentient intellect," is Zubiri's candidate for the specific difference of human beings as a species: a new type of sensation that is essentially different from the sense faculty of other animals, different by the addition of intelligence.

In what way is human sensation essentially different than the sensation of other animals? For Zubiri, part of every human sensation, but absent in animal sensation, is the awareness that the object sensed is real, i.e., that it is has the property of being something in and of itself, independent from me, that it is not a willful extension of me. This recognition of the real as real is the fundamental act of the intelligence; it is the intellectual act that is part and parcel, structurally, inextricably, of every act of human sensation. Thus, through the unitary faculty of the sentient intellect we apprehend reality as real. The consequence of this is that we are always already installed in reality. There is no question about how the mind reaches what is real, no need to build a bridge between the mind and reality.

The intellect, like the rest of the body, evolved as a response to challenges posed by the environment. Animals respond to stimuli while humans are confronted with possible realities. Animals are faced with a predetermined cast of responses to a given stimuli. But human beings in any given situation have an open spectrum of options from among which we must choose. We are, in effect, faced with the possibilities of many different realities, and our choices contribute to the determination of reality as it is realized; thus the name that Zubiri gives to human beings: the "reality animal." The openness of the options facing us is the structural basis of our freedom. Freedom is not something mysterious but a result of the evolutionary pressures that lead to the emergence of a sentient intelligence. The evolutionary niche occupied by human beings is one in which the cast of responses to a stimulus grew to the point where there was no longer anything automatic about which possible response would be enacted. Our niche is the one where the huge number of possible responses opened up different potential realities, allowing us more fully to exploit reality's possibilities. In other words, our niche is precisely the freedom to choose from among the huge number of possible responses, i.e., from among the huge number of possible realities. To manage this operation of choosing, animal sensation evolved into the sentient intellect.

So, according to Zubirian metaphysics, human beings are always already installed in reality as the part of reality whose actions determine future reality: humans are the part of reality that now unfolds further reality. In previous eras, the unfolding of reality took place by physical and biological forces, but now it is human forces (praxis) that unfolds reality. This is not to say that physical and biological forces are no longer present. They are present, and continue to form the foundation of praxis, but praxis outstrips them. An authentic praxis, however, must recognize its foundation in biology and physics - that is why the physical and biological needs of human beings must be met in order for the fullness of human praxis to be realizable. Thus, an authentic praxis must strive for a reality in which the physical and biological needs of all humans are met.

Ellacuría concludes from all of this that the primary question facing human beings - metaphysical and ethical at once – is: given that we are always already in reality, what is the proper way to engage it? Ellacuría characterizes Zubiri's intellectual motto as "to come as close as possible, intellectually, to the reality of things." Western philosophy “had not found an adequate way to shoulder responsibility for reality [hacerse cargo de la realidad]." The search for the right way to engage reality was the motivation for Ellacuría's work. For Ellacuría, humans are now shouldered with responsibility for reality in the sense of being charged with the task of figuring out what is the proper way of exercising the fundamental freedom opened up by the advent, within evolution, of the sentient intellect. In this sense, human beings are the responsible part of reality, i.e., the part of reality whose task it is to figure out how to respond to reality thereby creating a new reality unfolded out of the previous reality. In order for humans to properly exercise this responsibility, we must discern the direction in which reality needs to be taken.

The sentient intellect evolved to enable us to act more effectively in insuring our own survival. This is not selfish, as it may at first sound, given the element of responsibility that comes along with the sentient intellect. As the reality animal, our actions decide between various possible future realities. Thus, as the responsible part of reality, we are now charged with assisting in the further realization of reality. Ellacuría gives the special name of "praxis" to this action that determines reality.

If we look at the development of reality, we can discern a progression from matter, to life, to human life. This progression has been under the control of, first, physical forces, then biological forces, and now, with the evolution of the being with sentient intelligence, the progressive unfolding of reality is subject to the force of praxis. Thus there is a gradual liberation of more developed forces. Subsequent forces do not erase the earlier ones, but rather subsume them dialectically. Thus, human praxis cannot ignore the physical and biological needs of reality: these are the imperatives that must be satisfied on the way to the full realization of praxis itself. Reality has delivered, liberated, successively more developed forces, each layered over the previous: the biological on top of the physical, and the praxical on top of the biological. The direction of this process can be seen: praxis is the most advanced force reality has developed, and praxis must now take its place as the force that most drives the further unfolding of reality (just as physical and biological forces had, successively, taken that place previously). Since the essence of praxis is freedom, human beings must now exercise our freedom such that we further the proper development of reality. To remain true to our essence, and true to the essence of reality, we must act so as to further the development, the spread, of praxis. Thus, the direction of this process of liberation is the liberation of liberty itself, a process for which the reality animal, the praxical being, is responsible. Thus the full realization of reality entails this: praxical beings acting to bring about the realization of the reality in which all praxical beings (that is, all human beings) can realize the fullness of their praxical essence. In other words, physical and biological forces brought about human beings; but the nature of human beings is such that we are now responsible for the further and fuller realization of reality, which realization is precisely the liberation of all human beings such that they can realize the fullness of their essence. Thus Ellacuría is able to argue that the metaphysics of reality demands a liberatory praxis from us: liberation, because of the essence of human beings and the nature of reality, is a metaphysical imperative.

We can begin to see the prescriptions that emerge from the foregoing analysis. Ellacuría's liberation philosophy allows him to argue that the essence of being human demands that society be structured in such a way as to meet the physical and biological needs of human beings at an adequate level, i.e., a level that frees us to pursue our essence as praxical beings. Further, his analysis suggests that it is the duty of those of us who enjoy a wider exercise of freedom to dedicate our talents and efforts towards the construction of such a society: our essence as the leading edge of reality that is now responsible for the further unfolding of reality demands that we assist in the establishment of a reality in which praxis is more fully realized, i.e., a reality in which more people (ultimately, all people) are freed from basic wants (inflicted on them by poverty) so that they can exercise their praxis. In other words, the full self-realization of the privileged lies in their enlisting themselves in the struggles of the oppressed. This does not mean that the privileged have to become oppressed. Rather, it means that they should use the education and power delivered to them by their socially and historically conditioned privilege to further the struggles of the oppressed. Note that this is not paternalistic. The struggles of the oppressed represent the leading edge of reality's further development. The endeavors of the privileged apart from these struggles represent dead-end dilly-dallying (no matter how important they seem to those engaged in them) that does not further the humanization of reality and, thus, will not become an enduring part of human history. Far from paternalism, what saves the privileged from the meaningless pursuits with which they are wont to fill their time, and thus from a meaningless life, is the decision to lend their efforts to further the cause of the oppressed.

Thus, with Zubirian realism and in creative dialogue with Marx, Ellacuría undertook, from the perspective of the poor of the Third World, the project of forging a philosophy that recognized the material nature of being human - and thus the need to take into account the structures of poverty and oppression - while holding open the possibility of a transcendent realm, a realm one and the same with the material realm (actually part of the material realm) in which can exist human freedom and perhaps even God. Ellacuría was constructing a liberation philosophy in the service of the concrete needs of the Latin American people and of the Third World in general. It is a project in the service of which Ellacuría took great strides, but which remained unfinished at his death.

3. References and Further Reading

There still remain a number of unpublished pieces that are important to Ellacuría's liberation philosophy. These consist primarily of extensive notes he took for the courses he taught at the UCA. These, and all of Ellacuría's published and unpublished writings, are located in the Ignacio Ellacuría Archives at the Universidad Centroamericana (UCA) in San Salvador, El Salvador.

  • Burke, Kevin (2000). The Ground Beneath the Cross: The Theology of Ignacio Ellacuría, Washington, DC: Georgetown University Press.
    • In English, this book contains good chapters (chs. 2-4) on the philosophical foundation of Ellacuría's theological thought.
  • Cerutti, Horacio (1992). La Filosofia de la Liberación Latinoamericana, Mexico City: FCE.
    • The best overview of Latin American liberation philosophy, though the book was written before Ellacuría's contributions to the topic were widely known. Thus, Cerutti charts four main currents of Latin American liberation philosophy. Ellacuría's contributions represent a fifth current.
  • Ellacuría, Ignacio (2000-2002). Escritos Teológicos [ET], four volumes, San Salvador: UCA Editores.
    • Some philosophically important pieces are also collected here.
  • Ellacuría, Ignacio (1996-2001). Escritos Filosóficos [EF], three volumes, San Salvador: UCA Editores.
    • His scores of important philosophical essays have been collected here.
  • Ellacuría, Ignacio (1999). Escritos Universitarios [EU], San Salvador: UCA Editores.
    • Some philosophically important pieces are also collected here.
  • Ellacuría, Ignacio (1993). Veinte Años de Historia en El Salvador: Escritos Políticos [VA], three volumes, second edition, San Salvador: UCA Editores.
    • Some philosophically important pieces are also collected here.
  • Ellacuría, Ignacio (1990). Filosofía de la Realidad Histórica, San Salvador: UCA Editores.
    • Ellacuría's main philosophical work. This 600-page book was written and revised a couple of times in the early 1970s. It was never finished (there are indications in his notes that he intended to write more chapters) but it is fairly polished and the best indication of the scope and force of his argument for liberation philosophy.
  • Hassett, John & Hugh Lacey, eds. (1991). Towards a Society that Serves Its People: The Intellectual Contribution of El Salvador's Murdered Jesuits [TSSP], Washington, DC: Georgetown University Press.
    • English translations of eight of his essays (philosophical, theological and political).
  • Samour, Héctor (2002). Voluntad de Liberación: El Pensamiento Filosófico de Ignacio Ellacuría, San Salvador: UCA Editores.
    • The most thorough presentation of Ellacuría's philosophical thought. Samour is the scholar who has done the most to pull together, from the thousands of pages of unpublished and published material, Ellacuría's liberation philosophy and this comprehensive book is the result of his labors.
  • Whitfield, Teresa (1995). Paying the Price: Ignacio Ellacuría and the Murdered Jesuits of El Salvador, Philadelphia: Temple University Press.
    • The best intellectual biography on Ellacuría.

From among all of the collected essays, the most important for understanding Ellacuría's liberation philosophy are the following:

  • "Filosofía y Política" [1972], VA-1, pp. 47-62.
  • "Liberación: Misión y Carisma de la Iglesia" [1973], ET-2, pp. 553-584.
  • "Diez Años Después: ¿Es Posible una Universidad Distinta?" [1975], EU, pp. 49-92 (an English translation is available in TSSP, pp. 177-207).
  • "Hacia una Fundamentación del Método Teológico Latinoamericana" [1975], ET-1, pp. 187-218.
  • "Filosofía, ¿Para Qué?" [1976], EF-3, pp. 115-132.
  • "Fundamentación Biológica de la Ética" [1979], EF-3, pp, 251-269.
  • "Universidad y Política" [1980], VA-1, pp. 17-46.
  • "El Objeto de la Filosofía" [1981], VA-1, pp. 63-92.
  • "Función Liberadora de la Filosofía" [1985], VA-1, pp. 93-122.
  • "La Superación del Reduccionismo Idealista en Zubiri" [1988], EF-3, pp. 403-430.
  • "El Desafío de las Mayorías Populares" (1989), EU, pp. 297-306 (an English translation is available in TSSP, pp. 171-176).
  • "En Torno al Concepto y a la Idea de Liberación" [1989], ET-1, pp. 629-657.
  • "Utopía y Profetismo en América Latina" [1989], ET-2, pp. 233-294 (an English translation is available in TSSP, pp. 44-88).

Author Information

David I. Gandolfo
Furman University
U. S. A.

Gottlob Frege (1848—1925)

FregeGottlob Frege was a German logician, mathematician and philosopher who played a crucial role in the emergence of modern logic and analytic philosophy. Frege's logical works were revolutionary, and are often taken to represent the fundamental break between contemporary approaches and the older, Aristotelian tradition. He invented modern quantificational logic, and created the first fully axiomatic system for logic, which was complete in its treatment of propositional and first-order logic, and also represented the first treatment of higher-order logic. In the philosophy of mathematics, he was one of the most ardent proponents of logicism, the thesis that mathematical truths are logical truths, and presented influential criticisms of rival views such as psychologism and formalism. His theory of meaning, especially his distinction between the sense and reference of linguistic expressions, was groundbreaking in semantics and the philosophy of language. He had a profound and direct influence on such thinkers as Russell, Carnap and Wittgenstein. Frege is often called the founder of modern logic, and he is sometimes even heralded as the founder of analytic philosophy.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Works
  2. Contributions to Logic
  3. Contributions to the Philosophy of Mathematics
  4. The Theory of Sense and Reference
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. Frege's Own Works
    2. Important Secondary Works

1. Life and Works

Frege was born on November 8, 1848 in the coastal city of Wismar in Northern Germany. His full christened name was Friedrich Ludwig Gottlob Frege. Little is known about his youth. His father, Karl Alexander Frege, and his mother, Auguste (Bialloblotzsky) Frege, both worked at a girl's private school founded in part by Karl. Both were also principals of the school at various points: Karl held the position until his death 1866, when Auguste took over until her death in 1878. The German writer Arnold Frege, born in Wismar in 1852, may have been Frege's younger brother, but this has not been confirmed. Frege probably lived in Wismar until 1869; in the years from 1864-1869 he is known to have studied at the Gymnasium in Wismar.

In Spring 1869, Frege began studies at the University of Jena. There, he studied chemistry, philosophy and mathematics, and must have solidly impressed Ernst Abbe in mathematics, who later become of Frege's benefactors. After four semesters, Frege transferred to the University of Göttingen, where he studied mathematics and physics, as well as philosophy of religion under Hermann Lotze. (Lotze is sometimes thought to have had a profound impact on Frege's philosophical views.) In late 1873, Frege finished his doctoral dissertation, under the guidance of Ernst Schering, entitled Über eine geometrische Darstellung der imaginären Gebilde in der Ebene ("On a Geometrical Representation of Imaginary Figures in a Plane"), and received his Ph.D.

In 1874, with the recommendation of Ernst Abbe, Frege received a lectureship at the University of Jena, where he stayed the rest of his intellectual life. His position was unsalaried during his first five years, and he was supported by his mother. Frege's Habilitationsschrift, entitled Rechnungsmethoden, die auf eine Erweiterung des Grössenbegriffes gründen ("Methods of Calculation Based upon An Amplification of the Concept of Magnitude,"), was included with the material submitted to obtain the position. It involves the theory of complex mathematical functions, and contains seeds of Frege's advances in logic and the philosophy of mathematics.

Frege had a heavy teaching load during his first few years at Jena. However, he still had time to work on his first major work in logic, which was published in 1879 under the title Begriffsschrift, eine der arithmetischen nachgebildete Formelsprache des reinen Denkens ("Concept-Script: A Formula Language for Pure Thought Modeled on That of Arithmetic"). Therein, Frege presented for the first time his invention of a new method for the construction of a logical language. Upon the publication of the Begriffsschrift, he was promoted to ausserordentlicher Professor, his first salaried position. However, the book was not well-reviewed by Frege's contemporaries, who apparently found its two-dimensional logical notation difficult to comprehend, and failed to see its advantages over previous approaches, such as that of Boole.

Sometime after the publication of the Begriffsschrift, Frege was married to Margaret Lieseburg (1856-1905). They had at least two children, who unfortunately died young. Years later they adopted a son, Alfred. However, little else is known about Frege's family life.

Frege had aimed to use the logical language of the Begriffsschrift to carry out his logicist program of attempting to show that all of the basic truths of arithmetic could be derived from purely logical axioms. However, on the advice of Carl Stumpf, and given the poor reception of the Begriffsschrift, Frege decided to write a work in which he would describe his logicist views informally in ordinary language, and argue against rival views. The result was his Die Grundlagen der Arithmetik ("The Foundations of Arithmetic"), published in 1884. However, this work seems to have been virtually ignored by most of Frege's contemporaries.

Soon thereafter, Frege began working on his attempt to derive the basic laws of arithmetic within his logical language. However, his work was interrupted by changes to his views. In the late 1880s and early 1890s Frege developed new and interesting theories regarding the nature of language, functions and concepts, and philosophical logic, including a novel theory of meaning based on the distinction between sense and reference. These views were published in influential articles such as "Funktion und Begriff" ("Function and Concept", 1891), "Über Sinn und Bedeutung" ("On Sense and Reference", 1892) and "Über Begriff und Gegenstand" ("On Concept and Object", 1892). This maturation of Frege's semantic and philosophical views lead to changes in his logical language, forcing him to abandon an almost completed draft of his work in logic and the foundations of mathematics. However, in 1893, Frege finally finished a revised volume, employing a slightly revised logical system. This was his magnum opus, Grundgesetze der Arithmetik ("Basic Laws of Arithmetic"), volume I. In the first volume, Frege presented his new logical language, and proceeded to use it to define the natural numbers and their properties. His aim was to make this the first of a three volume work; in the second and third, he would move on to the definition of real numbers, and the demonstration of their properties.

Again, however, Frege's work was unfavorably reviewed by his contemporaries. Nevertheless, he was promoted once again in 1894, now to the position of Honorary Ordinary Professor. It is likely that Frege was offered a position as full Professor, but turned it down to avoid taking on additional administrative duties. His new position was unsalaried, but he was able to support himself and his family with a stipend from the Carl Zeiss Stiftung, a foundation that gave money to the University of Jena, and with which Ernst Abbe was intimately involved.

Because of the unfavorable reception of his earlier works, Frege was forced to arrange to have volume II of the Grundgesetze published at his own expense. It was not until 1902 that Frege was able to make such arrangements. However, while the volume was already in the publication process, Frege received a letter from Bertrand Russell, informing him that it was possible to prove a contradiction in the logical system of the first volume of the Grundgesetze, which included a naive calculus for classes. For more information, see the article on "Russell's Paradox". Frege was, in his own words, "thunderstruck". He was forced to quickly prepare an appendix in response. For the next couple years, he continued to do important work. A series of articles entitled "Über die Grundlagen der Geometrie," ("On the Foundations of Geometry") was published between 1903 and 1906, representing Frege's side of a debate with David Hilbert over the nature of geometry and the proper construction and understanding of axiomatic systems within mathematics.

However, around 1906, probably due to some combination of poor health, the early loss of his wife in 1905, frustration with his failure to find an adequate solution to Russell's paradox, and disappointment over the continued poor reception of his work, Frege seems to have lost his intellectual steam. He produced very little work between 1906 and his retirement in 1918. However, he continued to influence others during this period. Russell had included an appendix on Frege in his 1903 Principles of Mathematics. It is from this that Frege came be to be a bit wider known, including to an Austrian student studying engineering in Manchester, England, named Ludwig Wittgenstein. Wittgenstein studied the work of Frege and Russell closely, and in 1911, he wrote to both of them concerning his own solution to Russell's paradox. Frege invited him to Jena to discuss his views. Wittgenstein did so in late 1911. The two engaged in a philosophical debate, and while Wittgenstein reported that Frege "wiped the floor" with him, Frege was sufficiently impressed with Wittgenstein that he suggested that he go to Cambridge to study with Russell--a suggestion that had profound importance for the history of philosophy. Moreover, Rudolf Carnap was one of Frege's students from 1910 to 1913, and doubtlessly Frege had significant influence on Carnap's interest in logic and semantics and his subsequent intellectual development and successes.

After his retirement in 1918, Frege moved to Bad Kleinen, near Wismar, and managed to publish a number of important articles, "Der Gedanke" ("The Thought", 1918), "Der Verneinung" ("Negation", 1918), and "Gedankengefüge" ("Compound Thoughts", 1923). However, these were not wholly new works, but later drafts of works he had initiated in the 1890s. In 1924, a year before his death, Frege finally returned to the attempt to understand the foundations of arithmetic. However, by this time, he had completely given up on his logicism, concluding that the paradoxes of class or set theory made it impossible. He instead attempted to develop a new theory of the nature of arithmetic based on Kantian pure intuitions of space. However, he was not able to write much or publish anything about his new theory. Frege died on July 26, 1925 at the age of 76.

At the time of his death, Frege's own works were still not very widely known. He did not live to see the profound impact he would have on the emergence of analytic philosophy, nor to see his brand of logic--due to the championship of Russell--virtually wholly supersede earlier forms of logic. However, in bequeathing his unpublished work to his adopted son, Alfred, he wrote prophetically, "I believe there are things here which will one day be prized much more highly than they are now. Take care that nothing gets lost." Alfred later gave Frege's papers to Heinrich Scholz of the University of Münster for safekeeping. Unfortunately, however, they were destroyed in an Allied bombing raid on March 25, 1945. Although Scholz had made copies of some of the more important pieces, a good portion of Frege's unpublished works were lost.

Although he was a fierce, sometimes even satirical, polemicist, Frege himself was a quiet, reserved man. He was right-wing in his political views, and like many conservatives of his generation in Germany, he is known to have been distrustful of foreigners and rather anti-semitic. Himself Lutheran, Frege seems to have wanted to see all Jews expelled from Germany, or at least deprived of certain political rights. This distasteful feature of Frege's personality has gravely disappointed some of Frege's intellectual progeny.

2. Contributions to Logic

Trained as a mathematician, Frege's interests in logic grew out of his interests in the foundations of arithmetic. Early in his career, Frege became convinced that the truths of arithmetic are logical, analytic truths, agreeing with Leibniz, and disagreeing with Kant, who thought that arithmetical knowledge was grounded in "pure intuition", as well as more empiricist thinkers such as J. S. Mill, who thought that arithmetic was grounded in observation. In other words, Frege subscribed to logicism. His logicism was modest in one sense, but very ambitious in others. Frege's logicism was limited to arithmetic; unlike other important historical logicists, such as Russell, Frege did not think that geometry was a branch of logic. However, Frege's logicism was very ambitious in another regard, as he believed that one could prove all of the truths of arithmetic deductively from a limited number of logical axioms. Indeed, Frege himself set out to demonstrate all of the basic laws of arithmetic within his own system of logic.

Frege concurred with Leibniz that natural language was unsuited to such a task. Thus, Frege sought to create a language that would combine the tasks of what Leibniz called a "calculus ratiocinator" and "lingua characterica", that is, a logically perspicuous language in which logical relations and possible inferences would be clear and unambiguous. Frege's own term for such a language, "Begriffsschrift" was likely borrowed from a paper on Leibniz's ideas written by Adolf Trendelenburg. Although there had been attempts to fashion at least the core of such a language made by Boole and others working in the Leibnizian tradition, Frege found their work unsuitable for a number of reasons. Boole's logic used some of the same signs used in mathematics, except with different logical meanings. Frege found this unacceptable for a language which was to be used to demonstrate mathematical truths, because the signs would be ambiguous. Boole's logic, though innovative in some respects, was weak in others. It was divided into a "primary logic" and "secondary logic", bifurcating its propositional and categorical elements, and could not deal adequately with multiple generalities. It analyzed propositions in terms of subject and predicate concepts, which Frege found to be imprecise and antiquated.

Frege saw the formulae of mathematics as the paradigm of clear, unambiguous writing. Frege's brand of logical language was modeled upon the international language of arithmetic, and it replaced the subject/predicate style of logical analysis with the notions of function and argument. In mathematics, an equation such as "f(x) = x2 + 1" states that f is a function that takes x as argument and yields as value the result of multiplying x by itself and adding one. In order to make his logical language suitable for purposes other than arithmetic, Frege expanded the notion of function to allow arguments and values other than numbers. He defined a concept (Begriff) as a function that has a truth-value, either of the abstract objects the True or the False, as its value for any object as argument. See below for more on Frege's understanding of concepts, functions and objects. The concept being human is understood as a function that has the True as value for any argument that is human, and the False as value for anything else. Suppose that "H( )" stands for this concept, and "a" is a constant for Aristotle, and "b" is a constant for the city of Boston. Then "H(a)" stands for the True, while "H(b)" stands for the False. In Frege's terminology, an object for which a concept has the True as value is said to "fall under" the concept.

The values of such concepts could then be used as arguments to other functions. In his own logical systems, Frege introduced signs standing for the negation and conditional functions. His own logical notation was two-dimensional. However, let us instead replace Frege's own notation with more contemporary notation. For Frege, the conditional function, "→" is understood as a function the value of which is the False if its first argument is the True and the second argument is anything other than the True, and is the True otherwise. Therefore, "H(b) → H(a)" stands for the True, while "H(a) → H(b)" stands for the False. The negation sign "~" stands for a function whose value is the True for every argument except the True, for which its value is the False. Conjunction and disjunction signs could then be defined from the negation and conditional signs. Frege also introduced an identity sign, standing for a function whose value is the True if the two arguments are the same object, and the False otherwise, and a sign, which he called "the horizontal," namely "—", that stands for a function that has the True as value for the True as argument, and has the False as value for any other argument.

Variables and quantifiers are used to express generalities. Frege understands quantifiers as "second-level concepts". The distinction between levels of functions involves what kind of arguments the functions take. In Frege's view, unlike objects, all functions are "unsaturated" insofar as they require arguments to yield values. But different sorts of functions require different sorts of arguments. Functions that take objects as argument, such as those referred to by "( ) + ( )" or "H( )", are called first-level functions. Functions that take first-level functions as argument are called second-level functions. The quantifier, "∀x(...x...)", is understood as standing for a function that takes a first-level function as argument, and yields the True as value if the argument-function has the True as value for all values of x, and has the False as value otherwise. Thus, "∀xH(x)" stands for the False, since the concept H( ) does not have the True as value for all arguments. However, "∀x[H(x) → H(x)]" stands for True, since the complex concept H( ) → H( ) does have the True as value for all arguments. The existential quantifier, now written "∃x(...x...)" is defined as "~∀x~(...x...)".

Those familiar with modern predicate logic will recognize the parallels between it and Frege's logic. Frege is often credited with having founded predicate logic. However, Frege's logic is in some ways different from modern predicate logic. As we have seen, a sign such as "H( )" is a sign for a function in the strictest sense, as are the conditional and negation connectives. Frege's conditional is not, like the modern connective, something that flanks statements to form a statement. Rather, it flanks terms for truth-values to form a term for a truth-value. Frege's "H(b) → H(a)" is simply a name for the True, by itself it does not assert anything. Therefore, Frege introduces a sign he called the "judgment stroke", ⊢, used to assert that what follows it stands for the True. Thus, while "H(b) → H(a)" is simply a term for a truth-value, "⊢ H(b) → H(a)" asserts that this truth-value is the True, or in this case, that if Boston is human, then Aristotle is human. Moreover, Frege's logical system was second-order. In addition to quantifiers ranging over objects, it also contained quantifiers ranging over first-level functions. Thus, "⊢∀xF[F(x)]" asserts that every object falls under at least one concept.

Frege's logic took the form of an axiomatic system. In fact, Frege was the first to take a fully axiomatic approach to logic, and the first even to suggest that inference rules ought to be explicitly formulated and distinguished from axioms. He began with a limited number of fixed axioms, introduced explicit inference rules, and aimed to derive all other logical truths (including, for him, the truths of arithmetic) from them. Frege's first logical system, that of the 1879 Begriffsschrift, had nine axioms (one of which was not independent), one explicit inference rule, and also employed a second and third inference rule implicitly. It represented the first axiomatization of logic, and was complete in its treatment of both propositional logic and first-order quantified logic. Unlike Frege's later system, the system of the Begriffsschrift was fully consistent. (It has since been proven impossible to devise a system for higher-order logic with a finite number of axioms that is both complete and consistent.)

In order to make deduction easier, in the 1893 logical system of the Grundgesetze, Frege used fewer axioms and more inference rules: seven and twelve, respectively, this time leaving nothing implicit. The Grundgesetze also expanded upon the system of the Begriffsschrift by adding axioms governing what Frege called the "value-ranges" (Werthverlaüfe) of functions, understood as objects corresponding to the complete argument-value mappings generated by functions. In the case of concepts, their value-ranges were identified with their extensions. While Frege did sometimes also refer to the extensions of concepts as "classes", he did not conceive of such classes as aggregates or collections. They were simply understood as objects corresponding to the complete argument-value mappings generated by concepts considered as functions. Frege then introduced two axioms dealing with these value-ranges. Most infamous was his Basic Law V, which asserts that the truth-value of the value-range of function F being identical to the value-range of function G is the same as the truth-value of F and G having the same value for every argument. If one conceives of value-ranges as argument-value mappings, then this certainly seems to be a plausible hypothesis. However, from it, it is possible to prove a strong theorem of class membership: that for any object x, that object is in the extension of concept F if and only if the value of F for x as argument is the True. Given that value-ranges themselves are taken to be objects, if the concept in question is that of being a extension of a concept not included in itself, one can conclude that the extension of this concept is in itself just in case it is not. Therefore, the logical system of the Grundgesetze was inconsistent due to Russell's Paradox. See the entry on Russell's Paradox for more details. However, the core of the system of the Grundgesetze, that is, the system minus the axioms governing value-ranges, is consistent and, like the system of the Begriffsschrift, is complete in its treatment of propositional logic and first-order predicate logic.

Given the extent to which it is taken granted today, it can be difficult to fully appreciate the truly innovative and radical approach Frege took to logic. Frege was the first to attempt to transcribe the old statements of categorical logic in a language employing variables, quantifiers and truth-functions. Frege was the first to understand a statement such as "all students are hardworking" as saying roughly the same as, "for all values of x, if x is a student, then x is hardworking". This made it possible to capture the logical connection between statements such as "either all students are hardworking or all students are intelligent" and "all students are either hardworking or intelligent" (for example, that the first implies the second). In earlier logical systems such as that of Boole, in which the propositional and quantificational elements were bifurcated, the connection was wholly lost. Moreover, Frege's logical system was the first to be able to capture statements of multiple generality, such as "every person loves some city" by using multiple quantifiers in the same logical formula. This too was impossible in all earlier logical systems. Indeed, Frege's "firsts" in logic are almost too numerous to list. We have seen here that he invented modern quantification theory, presented the first complete axiomatization of propositional and first-order "predicate" logic (the latter of which he invented outright), attempted the first formulation of higher-order logic, presented the first coherent and full analysis of variables and functions, first showed it possible to reduce all truth-functions to negation and the conditional, and made the first clear distinction between axioms and inference rules in a formal system. As we shall see, he also made advances in the logic of mathematics. It is small wonder that he is often heralded as the founder of modern logic.

On Frege's "philosophy of logic", logic is made true by a realm of logical entities. Logical functions, value-ranges, and the truth-values the True and the False, are thought to be objectively real entities, existing apart from the material and mental worlds. (As we shall see below, Frege was also committed to other logical entities such as senses and thoughts.) Logical axioms are true because they express true thoughts about these entities. Thus, Frege denied the popular view that logic is without content and without metaphysical commitment. Frege was also a harsh critic of psychologism in logic: the view that logical truths are truths about psychology. While Frege believed that logic might prescribe laws about how people should think, logic is not the science of how people do think. Logical truths would remain true even if no one believed them nor used them in their reasoning. If humans were genetically designed to use regularly the so-called "inference rule" of affirming the consequent, etc., this would not make it logically valid. What is true or false, valid of invalid, does not depend on anyone's psychology or anyone's beliefs. To think otherwise is to confuse something's being true with something's being-taken-to-be-true.

3. Contributions to the Philosophy of Mathematics

Frege was an ardent proponent of logicism, the view that the truths of arithmetic are logical truths. Perhaps his most important contributions to the philosophy of mathematics were his arguments for this view. He also presented significant criticisms against rival views. We have seen that Frege was a harsh critic of psychologism in logic. He thought similarly about psychologism in mathematics. Numbers cannot be equated with anyone's mental images, nor truths of mathematics with psychological truths. Mathematical truths are objective, not subjective. Frege was also a critic of Mill's view that arithmetical truths are empirical truths, based on observation. Frege pointed out that it is not just observable things that can be counted, and that mathematical truths seem to apply also to these things. On Mill's view, numbers must be taken to be conglomerations of objects. Frege rejects this view for a number of reasons. Firstly, is one conglomeration of two things the same as a different conglomeration of two things, and if not, in what sense are they equal? Secondly, a conglomeration can be seen as made up of a different number of things, depending on how the parts are counted. One deck of cards contains fifty two cards, but each card consists of a multitude of atoms. There is no one uniquely determined "number" of the whole conglomeration. He also reiterated the arguments of others: that mathematical truths seem apodictic and knowable a priori. He also argued against the Kantian view that arithmetic truths are based on the pure intuition of the succession of time. His main argument against this view, however, was simply his own work in which he showed that truths about the nature of succession and sequence can be proven purely from the axioms of logic.

Frege was also an opponent of formalism, the view that arithmetic can be understood as the study of uninterpreted formal systems. While Frege's logical language represented a kind of formal system, he insisted that his formal system was important only because of what its signs represent and its propositions mean. The signs themselves, independently of what they mean, are unimportant. To suggest that mathematics is the study simply of the formal system, is, in Frege's eyes, to confuse the sign and thing signified. To suggest that arithmetic is the study of formal systems also suggests, absurdly, that the formula "5 + 7 = 12", written in Arabic numerals, is not the same truth as the formula, "V + VII = XII", written in Roman numerals. Frege suggests also that this confusion would have the absurd result that numbers simply are the numerals, the signs on the page, and that we should be able to study their properties with a microscope.

Frege suggests that rival views are often the result of attempting to understand the meaning of number terms in the wrong way, for example, in attempting to understand their meaning independently of the contexts in which they appear in sentences. If we are simply asked to consider what "two" means independently of the context of a sentence, we are likely to simply imagine the numeral "2", or perhaps some conglomeration of two things. Thus, in the Grundlagen, Frege espouses his famous context principle, to "never ask for the meaning of a word in isolation, but only in the context of a proposition." The Grundlagen is an earlier work, written before Frege had made the distinction between sense and reference (see below). It is an active matter of debate and discussion to what extent and how this principle coheres with Frege's later theory of meaning, but what is clear is that it plays an important role in his own philosophy of mathematics as described in the Grundlagen.

According to Frege, if we look at the contexts in which number words usually occur in a proposition, they appear as part of a sentence about a concept, specifically, as part of an expression that tells us how many times a certain concept is instantiated. Consider, for example, "I have six cards in my hand" or "There are 11 members of congress from Wisconsin." These propositions seem to tell us how many times the concepts of being a card in my hand and being a member of congress from Wisconsin are instantiated. Thus, Frege concludes that statements about numbers are statements about concepts. This insight was very important for Frege's case for logicism, as Frege was able to show that it is possible to define what it means for a concept to be instantiated a certain number of times purely logically by making use of quantifiers and identity. To say that the concept F is instantiated zero times is to say that there are no objects that instantiate F, or, equivalently, that everything does not instantiate F. To say that F is instantiated one time is to say there is an object x that instantiates F, and that for all objects y, either y does not instantiate F or y is x. To say that F is instantiated twice is to say that there are two objects, x and y, each of which instantiates F, but which are not the same as each other, and for all z, either z does not instantiate F, or z is x or z is y. One could then consider numbers as "second-level concepts", or concepts of concepts, which can be defined in purely logical terms. (For more on the distinction of levels of concepts, see above.)

Frege, however, does not leave his analysis of numbers there. Understanding number-claims as involving second-level concepts does give us some insight into the nature of numbers, but it cannot be left at this. Mathematics requires that numbers be treated as objects, and that we be able to provide a definition of the number "two" simpliciter, without having to speak of two Fs. For this purpose, Frege appeals to his theory of the value-ranges of concepts. On the notion of a value-range, see above. We saw above that we can gain some understanding of number claims as involving second-level concepts, or concepts of concepts. In order to find a definition of numbers as objects, Frege treats them instead as value-ranges of value-ranges. Exactly, however, are they to be understood?

Frege notes that we have an understanding of what it means to say that there are the same number of Fs as there are Gs. It is to say that there is a one-one mapping between the objects that instantiate F and the objects instantiating G, i.e. that there is some function f from entities that instantiate F onto entities that instantiate G such that there is a different F for every G, and a different G for every F, with none left over. (In this, Frege's views on the nature of cardinality were in part anticipated by Georg Cantor.) However, we must bear in mind that the propositions:

(1) There are equally many Fs as there are Gs.
(2) The number of Fs = the number of Gs

must obviously have the same truth-value, as they seem to express the same fact. We must, therefore, look for a way of understanding the phrase "the number of Fs" that occurs in (2) that makes clear how and why the whole proposition will be true or false for the same reason as (1) is true or false. Frege's suggestion is that "the number of Fs" means the same as "the value-range of the concept being a value-range of a concept instantiated equally many times as F." This means that the number of Fs is a certain value-range, containing value-ranges, and in particular, all those value-ranges that have as many members as there are Fs. Then (2) is understood as saying the same as "the value-range of the concept being a value-range of a concept instantiated equally many times as F = the value-range of the concept being a value-range of a concept instantiated equally many times as G", which will be true if and only if there are equally many Fs as Gs, i.e. if every value-range of a concept instantiated equally many times as F is also a value-range of a concept instantiated equally many times as G.

To give some examples, if there are zero Fs, then the number of Fs, i.e. zero, is the value-range consisting of all value-ranges with no members. Recall that for Frege, classes are identified with value-ranges of concepts. (See above.) To rephrase the same point in terms of classes, zero is the class of all classes with no members. Since there is only one such class, zero is the class containing only the empty class. If there is one F, then the number of Fs, i.e. one, is the class consisting of all classes with one member (the extensions of concepts instantiated once). Here we can see the connection with the understanding of number expressions as being statements about concepts. Rather than understanding zero as the concept a concept has just in case it is not instantiated, zero is understood as the value-range consisting of value-ranges of concepts that are not instantiated. Rather than understanding one as the concept a concept has just in case it is instantiated by a unique object, it is understood as the value-range consisting of value-ranges of concepts instantiated by unique objects. This allows us to understand numbers as abstract objects, and provide a clear definition of the meaning of number signs in arithmetic such as "1", "2", "3", etc.

Some of Frege's most brilliant work came in providing definitions of the natural numbers in his logical language, and in proving some of their properties therein. After laying out the basic laws of logic, and defining axioms governing the truth-functions and value-ranges, etc., Frege begins by defining a relation that holds between two value-ranges just in case they are the value-ranges of concepts instantiated equally many times. This relation holds between value-ranges just in case they are the same size, i.e. just in case there is one-one correspondence between the entities that fall under their concepts. Using this, he then defines a function that takes a value-range as argument and yields as value the value-range consisting of all value-ranges the same size as it. The number zero is then defined as the value-range consisting of all value-ranges the same size as the value-range of the concept being non-self-identical. Since this concept is not instantiated, zero is defined as the value-range of all value-ranges with no members, as described above. There is only one such number zero. Since this is true, then the concept of being identical to zero is instantiated once. Frege then uses this to define one. One is defined as the value-range of all value-ranges equal in size to the value-range of the concept being identical to zero. Having defined one is this way, Frege is able to define two. He has already defined one and zero; they are each unique, but different from each other. Therefore, two can be defined as the value-range of all value-ranges equal in size to the value-range of the concept being identical to zero or identical to one. Frege is able to define all natural numbers in this way, and indeed, prove that there are infinitely many of them. Each natural number can be defined in terms of the previous one: for each natural number n, its successor (n + 1) can be defined as the value-range of all value-ranges equal in size to the value-range of the concept of being identical to one of the numbers between zero and n.

In the Begriffsschrift, Frege had already been able to prove certain results regarding series and sequences, and was able to define the ancestral of a relation. To understand the ancestral of a relation, consider the example of the relation of being the child of. A person x bears this relation to y just in case x is y's child. However, x falls in the ancestral of this relation with respect to y just in case x is the child of y, or is the child of y's child, or is the child of y's child's child, etc. Frege was able to define the ancestral of relations logically even in his early work. He put this to use in the Grundgesetze to define the natural numbers. We have seen how the notion of successorship can be defined for Frege, i.e. the relation n + 1 bears to n. The natural numbers can be defined as the value-range of all value-ranges that fall under the ancestral of the successor relation with respect to zero. The natural numbers then consist of zero, the successor of zero (one), the successor of the successor of zero (two), and so on ad infinitum. Frege was then able to use this definition of the natural numbers to provide a logical analysis of mathematical induction, and prove that mathematical induction can be used validly to demonstrate the properties of the natural numbers, an extremely important result for making good on his logicist ambitions. Frege could then use mathematical induction to prove some of the basic laws of the natural numbers. Frege next turned his logicist method to an analysis of integers (including negative numbers) and then to the real numbers, defining them using the natural numbers and certain relations holding between them. We need not dwell on the details of this work here.

Frege's approach to providing a logical analysis of cardinality, the natural numbers, infinity and mathematical induction were groundbreaking, and have had a lasting importance within mathematical logic. Indeed, prior to 1902, it must have seemed to him that he had been completely successful in showing that the basic laws of arithmetic could be understood purely as logical truths. However, as we have seen, Frege's definition of numbers heavily involves the notion of classes or value-ranges, but his logical treatment of them is shown to be impossible due to Russell's paradox. This presents a serious problem for Frege's logicist approach. Another heavy blow came after Frege's death. In 1931, Kurt Gödel discovered his famous incompleteness proof to the effect that there can be no consistent formal system with a finite number of axioms in which it is possible to derive all of the truths of arithmetic. This presents a serious blow to more ambitious forms of logicism, such as Frege's, which aimed to provide precisely the sort of system Gödel showed impossible. Nevertheless, it cannot be denied that Frege's work in the philosophy of mathematics was important and insightful.

4. The Theory of Sense and Reference

Frege's influential theory of meaning, the theory of sense (Sinn) and reference (Bedeutung) was first outlined, albeit briefly, in his article, "Funktion und Begriff" of 1891, and was expanded and explained in greater detail in perhaps his most famous work, "Über Sinn und Bedeutung" of 1892. In "Funktion und Begriff", the distinction between the sense and reference of signs in language is first made in regard to mathematical equations. During Frege's time, there was a widespread dispute among mathematicians as to how the sign, "=", should be understood. If we consider an equation such as, "4 x 2 = 11 - 3", a number of Frege's contemporaries, for a variety of reasons, were wary of viewing this as an expression of an identity, or, in this case, as the claim that 4 x 2 and 11 - 3 are one and the same thing. Instead, they posited some weaker form of "equality" such that the numbers 4 x 2 and 11 - 3 would be said to be equal in number or equal in magnitude without thereby constituting one and the same thing. In opposition to the view that "=" signifies identity, such thinkers would point out that 4 x 2 and 11 - 3 cannot in all ways be thought to be the same. The former is a product, the latter a difference, etc.

In his mature period, however, Frege was an ardent opponent of this view, and argued in favor of understanding "=" as identity proper, accusing rival views of confusing form and content. He argues instead that expressions such as "4 x 2" and "11 - 3" can be understood as standing for one and the same thing, the number eight, but that this single entity is determined or presented differently by the two expressions. Thus, he makes a distinction between the actual number a mathematical expression such as "4 x 2" stands for, and the way in which that number is determined or picked out. The former he called the reference (Bedeutung) of the expression, and the latter was called the sense (Sinn) of the expression. In Fregean terminology, an expression is said to express its sense, and denote or refer to its reference.

The distinction between reference and sense was expanded, primarily in "Über Sinn und Bedeutung" as holding not only for mathematical expressions, but for all linguistic expressions (whether the language in question is natural language or a formal language). One of his primary examples therein involves the expressions "the morning star" and "the evening star". Both of these expressions refer to the planet Venus, yet they obviously denote Venus in virtue of different properties that it has. Thus, Frege claims that these two expressions have the same reference but different senses. The reference of an expression is the actual thing corresponding to it, in the case of "the morning star", the reference is the planet Venus itself. The sense of an expression, however, is the "mode of presentation" or cognitive content associated with the expression in virtue of which the reference is picked out.

Frege puts the distinction to work in solving a puzzle concerning identity claims. If we consider the two claims:

(1) the morning star = the morning star

(2) the morning star = the evening star

The first appears to be a trivial case of the law of self-identity, knowable a priori, while the second seems to be something that was discovered a posteriori by astronomers. However, if "the morning star" means the same thing as "the evening star", then the two statements themselves would also seem to have the same meaning, both involving a thing's relation of identity to itself. However, it then becomes to difficult to explain why (2) seems informative while (1) does not. Frege's response to this puzzle, given the distinction between sense and reference, should be apparent. Because the reference of "the evening star" and "the morning star" is the same, both statements are true in virtue of the same object's relation of identity to itself. However, because the senses of these expressions are different--in (1) the object is presented the same way twice, and in (2) it is presented in two different ways--it is informative to learn of (2). While the truth of an identity statement involves only the references of the component expressions, the informativity of such statements involves additionally the way in which those references are determined, i.e. the senses of the component expressions.

So far we have only considered the distinction as it applies to expressions that name some object (including abstract objects, such as numbers). For Frege, the distinction applies also to other sorts of expressions and even whole sentences or propositions. If the sense/reference distinction can be applied to whole propositions, it stands to reason that the reference of the whole proposition depends on the references of the parts and the sense of the proposition depends of the senses of the parts. (At some points, Frege even suggests that the sense of a whole proposition is composed of the senses of the component expressions.) In the example considered in the previous paragraph, it was seen that the truth-value of the identity claim depends on the references of the component expressions, while the informativity of what was understood by the identity claim depends on the senses. For this and other reasons, Frege concluded that the reference of an entire proposition is its truth-value, either the True or the False. The sense of a complete proposition is what it is we understand when we understand a proposition, which Frege calls "a thought" (Gedanke). Just as the sense of a name of an object determines how that object is presented, the sense of a proposition determines a method of determination for a truth-value. The propositions, "2 + 4 = 6" and "the Earth rotates", both have the True as their references, though this is in virtue of very different conditions holding in the two cases, just as "the morning star" and "the evening star" refer to Venus in virtue of different properties.

In "Über Sinn und Bedeutung", Frege limits his discussion of the sense/reference distinction to "complete expressions" such as names purporting to pick out some object and whole propositions. However, in other works, Frege makes it quite clear that the distinction can also be applied to "incomplete expressions", which include functional expressions and grammatical predicates. These expressions are incomplete in the sense that they contain an "empty space", which, when filled, yields either a complex name referring to an object, or a complete proposition. Thus, the incomplete expression "the square root of ( )" contains a blank spot, which, when completed by an expression referring to a number, yields a complex expression also referring to a number, e.g., "the square root of sixteen". The incomplete expression, "( ) is a planet" contains an empty place, which, when filled with a name, yields a complete proposition. According to Frege, the references of these incomplete expressions are not objects but functions. Objects (Gegenstände), in Frege's terminology, are self-standing, complete entities, while functions are essentially incomplete, or as Frege says, "unsaturated" (ungesättigt) in that they must take something else as argument in order to yield a value. The reference of the expression "square root of ( )" is thus a function, which takes numbers as arguments and yields numbers as values. The situation may appear somewhat different in the case of grammatical predicates. However, because Frege holds that complete propositions, like names, have objects as their references, and in particular, the truth-values the True or the False, he is able to treat predicates also as having functions as their references. In particular, they are functions mapping objects onto truth-values. The expression, "( ) is a planet" has as its reference a function that yields as value the True when saturated by an object such as Saturn or Venus, but the False when saturated by a person or the number three. Frege calls such a function of one argument place that yields the True or False for every possible argument a "concept" (Begriff), and calls similar functions of more than one argument place (such as that denoted by "( ) > ( )", which is doubly in need of saturation), "relations".

It is clear that functions are to be understood as the references of incomplete expressions, but what of the senses of such expressions? Here, Frege tells us relatively little save that they exist. There is some amount of controversy among interpreters of Frege as to how they should be understood. It suffices here to note that just as the same object (e.g. the planet Venus), can be presented in different ways, so also can a function be presented in different ways. While "identity", as Frege uses the term, is a relation holding only between objects, Frege believes that there is a relation similar to identity that holds between functions just in case they always share the same value for every argument. Since all and only those things that have hearts have kidneys, strictly speaking, the concepts denoted by the expressions "( ) has a heart", and "( ) has a kidney" are one and the same. Clearly, however, these expressions do not present that concept in the same way. For Frege, these expressions would have different senses but the same reference. Frege also tells us that it is the incomplete nature of these senses that provides the "glue" holding together the thoughts of which they form a part.

Frege also uses the distinction to solve what appears to be a difficulty with Leibniz's law with regard to identity. This law was stated by Leibniz as, "those things are the same of which one can be substituted for another without loss of truth," a sentiment with which Frege was in full agreement. As Frege understands this, it means that if two expressions have the same reference, they should be able to replace each other within any proposition without changing the truth-value of that proposition. Normally, this poses no problem. The inference from:

(3) The morning star is a planet.

to the conclusion:

(4) The evening star is a planet.

in virtue of (2) above and Leibniz's law is unproblematically valid. However, there seem to be some serious counterexamples to this principle. We know for example that "the morning star" and "the evening star" have the same customary reference. However, it is not always true that they can replace one another without changing the truth of a sentence. For example, if we consider the propositions:

(5) Gottlob believes that the morning star is a planet.

(6) Gottlob believes that the evening star is a planet.

If we assume that Gottlob does not know that the morning star is the same heavenly body as the evening star, (5) may be true while (6) false or vice versa.

Frege meets this challenge to Leibniz's law by making a distinction between what he calls the primary and secondary references of expressions. Frege suggests that when expressions appear in certain unusual contexts, they have as their references what is customarily their senses. In such cases, the expressions are said to have their secondary references. Typically, such cases involve what Frege calls "indirect speech" or "oratio obliqua", as in the case of statements of beliefs, thoughts, desires and other so-called "propositional attitudes", such as the examples of (5) and (6). However, expressions also have their secondary references (for reasons which should already be apparent) in contexts such as "it is informative that..." or "... is analytically true".

Let us consider the examples of (5) and (6) more closely. To Frege's mind, these statements do not deal directly with the morning star and the evening star itself. Rather, they involve a relation between a believer and a thought believed. Thoughts, as we have seen, are the senses of complete propositions. Beliefs depend for their make-up on how certain objects and concepts are presented, not only on the objects and concepts themselves. The truth of belief claims, therefore, will depend not on the customary references of the component expressions of the stated belief, but their senses. Since the truth-value of the whole belief claim is the reference of that belief claim, and the reference of any proposition, for Frege, depends on the references of its component expressions, we are lead to the conclusion that the typical senses of expressions that appear in oratio obliqua are in fact the references of those expressions when they appear in that context. Such contexts can be referred to as "oblique contexts", contexts in which the reference of an expression is shifted from its customary reference to its customary sense.

In this way, Frege is able to actually retain his commitment in Leibniz's law. The expressions "the morning star" and "the evening star" have the same primary reference, and in any non-oblique context, they can replace each other without changing the truth-value of the proposition. However, since the senses of these expressions are not the same, they cannot replace each other in oblique contexts, because in such contexts, their references are non-identical.

Frege ascribes to senses and thoughts objective existence. In his mind, they are objects every bit as real as tables and chairs. Their existence is not dependent on language or the mind. Instead, they are said to exist in a timeless "third realm" of sense, existing apart from both the mental and the physical. Frege concludes this because, although senses are obviously not physical entities, their existence likewise does not depend on any one person's psychology. A thought, for example, has a truth-value regardless of whether or not anyone believes it and even whether or not anyone has grasped it at all. Moreover, senses are interpersonal. Different people are able to grasp the same senses and same thoughts and communicate them, and it is even possible for expressions in different languages to express the same sense or thought. Frege concludes that they are abstract objects, incapable of full causal interaction with the physical world. They are actual only in the very limited sense that they can have an effect on those who grasp them, but are themselves incapable of being changed or acted upon. They are neither created by our uses of language or acts of thinking, nor destroyed by their cessation.

Unfortunately, Frege does not tell us very much about exactly how these abstract objects pick out or present their references. Exactly what is it that makes a sense a "way of determining" or "mode of presenting" a reference? In the wake of Russell's theory of descriptions, a Fregean sense is often interpreted as a set of descriptive information or criteria that picks out its reference in virtue of the reference alone satisfying or fitting that descriptive information. In giving examples, Frege implies that a person might attach to the name "Aristotle" the sense the pupil of Plato and teacher of Alexander the Great. This sense picks out Aristotle the person because he alone matches this description. Here, care must be taken to avoid misunderstanding. The sense of the name "Aristotle" is not the words "the pupil of Plato and teacher of Alexander the Great"; to repeat, senses are not linguistic items. It is rather that the sense consists in some set of descriptive information, and this information is best described by a descriptive phrase of this form. The property of being the pupil of Plato and teacher of Alexander is unique to Aristotle, and thus, it may be in virtue of associating this information with the name "Aristotle" that this name may be used to refer to Aristotle. As certain commentators have noted, it is not even necessary that the sense of the name be expressible by some descriptive phrase, because the descriptive information or properties in virtue of which the reference is determined may not be directly nameable in any natural language.

From this standpoint, it is easy to understand how there might be senses that do not pick out any reference. Names such as "Romulus" or "Odysseus", and phrases such as "the least rapidly converging series" or "the present King of France" express senses, insofar as they lay out criteria that things would have to satisfy if they were to be the references of these expressions. However, there are no things which do in fact satisfy these criteria. Therefore, these expressions are meaningful, but do not have references. Because the sense of a whole proposition is determined by the senses of the parts, and the reference of a whole proposition is determined by the parts, Frege claims that propositions in which such expressions appear are able to express thoughts, but are neither true nor false, because no references are determined for them.

This interpretation of the nature of senses makes Frege a forerunner to what has since been come to be known as the "descriptivist" theory of meaning and reference in the philosophy of language. The view that the sense of a proper name such as "Aristotle" could be descriptive information as simple as the pupil of Plato and teacher of Alexander the Great, however, has been harshly criticized by many philosophers, and perhaps most notably by Saul Kripke. Kripke points out that this would make a claim such as "Aristotle taught Alexander" seem to be a necessary and analytic truth, which it does not appear to be. Moreover, he claims that many of us seem to be able to use a name to refer to an individual even if we are unaware of any properties uniquely held by that individual. For example, many of us don't know enough about the physicist Richard Feynman to be able to identify a property differentiating him from other prominent physicists such as Murray Gell-Mann, but we still seem to be able to refer to Feynman with the name "Feynman". John Searle, Michael Dummett and others, however, have proposed ways of expanding or altering Frege's notion of a sense to circumvent Kripke's worries. This has lead to a very important debate in the philosophy of language, which, unfortunately, we cannot fully discuss here.

5. References and Further Reading

a. Frege's Own Works

  • "Antwort auf die Ferienplauderei des Herrn Thomae." Jahresbericht der Deutschen Mathematiker-Vereinigung 15 (1906): 586-90. Translated as "Reply to Thomae's Holiday Causerie." In Collected Papers on Mathematics, Logic and Philosophy [CP], 341-5. Translated by M. Black, V. Dudman, P. Geach, H. Kaal, E.-H. W. Kluge, B. McGuinness and R. H. Stoothoff. New York: Basil Blackwell, 1984.
  • "Über Begriff und Gegenstand." Vierteljahrsschrift für wissenschaftliche Philosophie 16 (1892): 192-205. Translated as "On Concept and Object." In >CP 182-94. Also in The Frege Reader [FR], 181-93. Edited by Michael Beaney. Oxford: Blackwell, 1997. And In Translations from the Philosophical Writings of Gottlob Frege [TPW], 42-55. 3d ed. Edited by Peter Geach and Max Black. Oxford: Blackwell, 1980.
  • Begriffsschrift, eine der arithmetischen nachgebildete Formelsprache des reinen Denkens. Halle: L. Nebert, 1879. Translated as Begriffsschrift, a Formula Language, Modeled upon that of Arithmetic, for Pure Thought. In From Frege to Gödel, edited by Jean van Heijenoort. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1967. Also as Conceptual Notation and Related Articles. Edited and translated by Terrell W. Bynum. London: Oxford University Press, 1972.
  • "Über die Begriffsschrift des Herrn Peano und meine eigene." Verhandlungen der Königlich Sächsischen Gesellschaft der Wissenschaften zu Leipzig 48 (1897): 362-8. Translated as "On Mr. Peano's Conceptual Notation and My Own." In CP 234-48.
  • "Über formale Theorien der Arithmetik." Sitzungsberichte der Jenaischen Gesellschaft für Medizin und Naturwissenschaft 19 (1885): 94-104. Translated as "On Formal Theories of Arithmetic." In CP 112-21.
  • Funktion und Begriff. Jena: Hermann Pohle, 1891. Translated as "Function and Concept." In CP 137-56, TPW 21-41 and FR 130-48.
  • "Der Gedanke." Beträge zur Philosophie des deutschen Idealismus 1 (1918-9): 58-77. Translated as "Thoughts." In CP 351-72. Also as part I of Logical Investigations [LI], edited by P. T. Geach. Oxford: Blackwell, 1977. And as "Thought." In FR 325-45.
  • "Gedankengefüge." Beträge zur Philosophie des deutschen Idealismus 3 (1923): 36-51. Translated as "Compound Thoughts." In CP 390-406, and as part III of LI.
  • Über eine geometrische Darstellung der imaginären Gebilde in der Ebene. Ph. D. Dissertation: University of Göttingen, 1873. Translated as "On a Geometrical Representation of Imaginary Forms in the Plane." In CP 1-55.
  • Grundgesetze der Arithmetik. 2 vols. Jena: Hermann Pohle, 1893-1903. Translated in part as The Basic Laws of Arithmetic: Exposition of the System. Edited and translated by Montgomery Furth. Berkeley: University of California Press, 1964.
  • "Über die Grundlagen der Geometrie." Jahresbericht der Deutschen Mathematiker-Vereinigung 12 (1903): 319-24, 368-75, 15 (1906): 293-309, 377-403, 423-30. Translated as "On the Foundations of Geometry." In CP 273-340. Also as On the Foundations of Geometry and Formal Theories of Arithmetic. Translated by Eike-Henner W. Kluge. New York: Yale University Press, 1971.
  • Die Grundlagen der Arithmetik, eine logisch mathematische Untersuchung über den Begriff der Zahl. Breslau: W. Koebner, 1884. Translated as The Foundations of Arithmetic: A Logico-Mathematical Enquiry into the Concept of Number. 2d ed. Translated by J. L. Austin. Oxford: Blackwell, 1953.
  • "Kritische Beleuchtung einiger Punkte in E. Schröders Vorlesungen über die Algebra der Logik." Archiv für systematsche Philosophie 1 (1895): 433-56. Translated as "A Critical Elucidation of Some Points in E. Schröder, Vorlesungen über die Algebra der Logik." In CP 210-28, and TPW 86-106.
  • Nachgelassene Schriften. Hamburg: Felix Meiner, 1969. Translated as Posthumous Writings. Translated by Peter Long and Roger White. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1979.
  • "Le nombre entier." Revue de Métaphysique et de Morale 3 (1895): 73-8. Translated as "Whole Numbers." In CP 229-33.
  • Rechnungsmethoden, die auf eine Erweiterung des Grössenbegriffes gründen. Habilitationsschrift: University of Jena, 1874. Translated as "Methods of Calculation based on an Extension of the Concept of Quantity." In CP 56-92.
  • Review of Zur Lehre vom Transfiniten, by Georg Cantor. Zeitschrift für Philosophie und philosophische Kritik 100 (1892): 269-72. Translated in CP 178-181.
  • Review of Philosophie der Arithmetik, by Edmund Husserl. Zeitschrift für Philosophie und philosophische Kritik 103 (1894): 313-32. Translated in CP 195-209.
  • "Über Sinn und Bedeutung." Zeitschrift für Philosophie und philosophische Kritik 100 (1892): 25-50. Translated as "On Sense and Meaning." In CP 157-77. As "On Sinn and Bedeutung." In FR 151-71. And as "On Sense and Reference." In TPW 56-78.
  • "Über das Trägheitsgesetz." Zeitschrift für Philosophie und philosophische Kritik 98 (1891): 145-61. Translated as "On the Law of Inertia." In CP 123-36.
  • "Die Unmöglichkeit der Thomaeschen formalen Arithmetik aus Neue nachgewiesen." Jahresbericht der Deutschen Mathematiker-Vereinigung 17 (1908): 52-5. Translated as "Renewed Proof of the Impossibility of Mr. Thomae's Formal Arithmetic." In CP 346-50.
  • "Der Verneinung." Beträge zur Philosophie des deutschen Idealismus 1 (1918-9): 143-57. Translated as "Negation." In CP 373-89, part II of LI, and FR 346-61.
  • "Was ist ein Funktion?" In Festschrift Ludwig Boltzmann gewidmet zum sechzigsten Geburtstage, 656-66. Leipzig: Amrosius Barth, 1904. Translated as "What is a Function?" In CP 285-92, and TPW 285-92.
  • Wissenschaftlicher Briefwechsel. Hamburg: Felix Meiner, 1976. Translated as Philosophical and Mathematical Correspondence. Translated by Hans Kaal. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1980.
  • Über die Zahlen des Herrn H. Schubert. Jena: Hermann Pohle, 1899. Translated as "On Mr. H. Schubert's Numbers." In CP 249-72.

b. Important Secondary Works

  • Angelelli, Ignacio. Studies on Gottlob Frege and Traditional Philosophy. Dordrecht: D. Reidel, 1967.
  • Baker, G. P. and P. M. S. Hacker. Frege: Logical Excavations. New York: Oxford University Press, 1984.
  • Beaney, Michael. Frege: Making Sense. London: Duckworth, 1996.
  • Beaney, Michael. Introduction to The Frege Reader, by Gottlob Frege. Oxford: Blackwell, 1997.
  • Bell, David. Frege's Theory of Judgment. New York: Oxford University Press, 1979.
  • Bynum, Terrell W. "On the Life and Work of Gottlob Frege. " Introduction to Conceptual Notation and Related Articles, by Gottlob Frege. London: Oxford University Press, 1972.
  • Carl, Wolfgang. Frege's Theory of Sense and Reference. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1994.
  • Carnap, Rudolph. Meaning and Necessity. 2d ed. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1956.
  • Church, Alonzo. "A Formulation of the Logic of Sense and Denotation." In Structure, Method and Meaning: Essays in Honor of Henry M. Sheffer, edited by P. Henle, H. Kallen and S. Langer, 3- 24. New York: Liberal Arts Press, 1951.
  • Currie, Gregory. Frege: An Introduction to His Philosophy. Totowa, NJ: Barnes and Noble, 1982.
  • Dummett, Michael. Frege: Philosophy of Language. 2d ed. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1981.
  • Dummett, Michael. Frege: Philosophy of Mathematics. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1991.
  • Dummett, Michael. Frege and Other Philosophers. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1991.
  • Dummett, Michael. The Interpretation of Frege's Philosophy. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1981.
  • Geach, Peter T. "Frege." In Three Philosophers, edited by G. E. M. Anscombe and P. T. Geach, 127-62. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1961.
  • Gödel, Kurt. "On Formally Undecidable Propositions of Principia Mathematica and Related Systems I." In From Frege to Gödel, edited by Jan van Heijenoort, 596-616. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1967. Originally published as "Über formal unentscheidbare Sätze der Principia Mathematica und verwandter Systeme I." Monatshefte für Mathematik und Physik 38 (1931): 173-98.
  • Grossmann, Reinhardt. Reflections on Frege's Philosophy. Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 1969.
  • Haaparanta, Leila and Jaakko Hintikka, eds. Frege Synthesized. Boston: D. Reidel, 1986.
  • Kaplan, David. "Quantifying In." Synthese 19 (1968): 178-214.
  • Klemke, E. D., ed. Essays on Frege. Urbana: University of Illinois Press, 1968.
  • Kluge, Eike-Henner W. The Metaphysics of Gottlob Frege. Boston: Martinus Nijhoff, Boston, 1980.
  • Kneale, William and Martha Kneale. The Development of Logic. London: Oxford University Press, 1962.
  • Kripke, Saul. Naming and Necessity. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1980. First published in Semantics of Natural Languages. Edited by Donald Davidson and Gilbert Harman. Dordrecht: D. Reidel, 1972.
  • Linsky, Leonard. Oblique Contexts. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1983.
  • Resnik, Michael D. Frege and the Philosophy of Mathematics. Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1980.
  • Ricketts, Thomas G., ed. The Cambridge Companion to Frege. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, forthcoming.
  • Russell, Bertrand. "The Logical and Arithmetical Doctrines of Frege." In The Principles of Mathematics, Appendix A. 1903. 2d. ed. Reprint, New York: W. W. Norton & Company, 1996.
  • Russell, Bertrand. "On Denoting." Mind 14 (1905): 479-93.
  • Salmon, Nathan. Frege's Puzzle. Cambridge: MIT Press, 1986.
  • Schirn. Matthias, ed. Logik und Mathematik: Frege Kolloquium 1993. Hawthorne: de Gruyter, 1995.
  • Schirn. Matthias, ed. Studien zu Frege. 3 vols. Stuttgart-Bad Cannstatt: Verlag-Holzboog, 1976.
  • Searle, John R. Intentionality: An Essay in the Philosophy of Mind. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1983.
  • Sluga, Hans. "Frege and the Rise of Analytic Philosophy." Inquiry 18 (1975): 471-87.
  • Sluga, Hans. Gottlob Frege. Boston: Routledge & Kegan Paul, 1980.
  • Sluga, Hans. The Philosophy of Frege. 4 vols. New York: Garland Publishing, 1993.
  • Sternfeld, Robert. Frege's Logical Theory. Carbondale: Southern Illinois University Press, 1966.
  • Thiel, Christian. Sense and Reference in Frege's Logic. Translated by T. J. Blakeley. Dordrecht: D. Reidel, 1968.
  • Tichý, Pavel. The Foundations of Frege's Logic. New York: Walter de Gruyter, 1988.
  • Walker, Jeremy D. B. A Study of Frege. London: Oxford University Press, 1965.
  • Weiner, Joan. Frege in Perspective. Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1990.
  • Wright, Crispin. Frege's Conception of Numbers as Objects. Aberdeen: Aberdeen University Press, 1983.
  • Wright, Crispin. Frege: Tradition and Influence. Oxford: Blackwell, 1984.

Author Information

Kevin C. Klement
University of Massachusetts, Amherst
U. S. A.

Nikolai Fedorovich Fedorov (1829—1903)

FedorovFedorov's thoughts have been variously described as bold, culminating, curious, easily-misunderstood, extreme, hazy, idealist, naive, of-value, scientifico-magical, special, unexpected, unique, and utopian. Many of the small number of philosophers familiar with Fedorov admit his originality, his independence, his human concern, perhaps even his logic -- up to a point. But his resurrection project is viewed with understandable skepticism and often dismissed as an impossible fantasy. Interestingly, the harshest criticism has come from Christian thinkers such as Florovsky and Ustryalov whose objections bear religious overtones; some materialists such as Muravyov and Setnitsky have been quite benign and favorable by comparison. Perhaps all would agree, however, on Fedorov's single-mindedness. Looked at positively, this is simply another term for purity-of-heart, a quality of saintliness. With his strong emphasis on kinship and brotherhood demanding, ultimately, a world in which all must mutually benefit, Fedorov perhaps anticipates Rawls who says: "Thus what we are doing is to combine into one conception the totality of conditions that we are ready upon due reflection to recognize as reasonable in our conduct with regard to one another. ... all persons ... even ... persons who are not contemporaries but who belong to many generations. Thus to see our place in society from the perspective of this position is ... to regard the human situation not only from all social but also from all temporal points of view. The perspective of eternity is not a perspective from a certain place beyond the world, nor the point of view of a transcendent being; rather it is a certain form of thought and feeling that rational persons can adopt within the world. ... Purity of heart, if one could attain it, would be to see clearly and to act with grace and self-command from this point of view." Fedorov wrote: "By refusing to grant ourselves the right to set ourselves apart ... we are kept from setting any goal for ourselves that is not the common task of all." But Fedorov's thought soars beyond the present world to a world of its own, in his insistence that we can become immortal and godlike through rational efforts, and that our moral obligation is to create a heaven to be shared by all who ever lived.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Philosophy
  3. Further Reading

1. Life

Russian philosopher, teacher, and librarian Nikolai Fedorovich Fedorov was born June 9, 1829, and died December 28, 1903. He was founder of an immortalist (anti-death) philosophy emphasizing "the common task" of resurrecting the dead through scientific means. Since the end of the Cold War, his thought has received renewed interest and advocacy in Russia and elsewhere -- for example, in connection with cryonics (cryonic hibernation) and prolongevity. Nikolai Fedorovich Fedorov (alternative romanized spellings are possible -- for example: Nicholas Fyodorovich Fyodorov) advocated the ethical priority of a research and development project he called "the common task," by which he meant the universal physical resurrection of the dead by future advances in science and technology. He was highly praised by such people as Fyodor Dostoevsky and Leo Tolstoy (literature), Afanasi Fet (poetry), and Konstantin Tsiolkowsky (astronautics), yet he is not well known in the West, despite some limited interest. The illegitimate son of Prince Pavel Ivanovich Gagarin and Elisaveta Ivanova, a woman of lower-class nobility, Nikolai (with his mother and her other children) had to leave his father's home at age four, due to the prince's death. The family continued to be well cared for, however. Beginning in 1868, he worked for 25 years as a librarian with the Rumiantsev Museum (now the Russian State Library), Moscow; during this period, he was teacher-mentor of the young Konstantin Tsiolkowsky. After retiring, and until his death, he worked in the Archives of the Ministry of Foreign Affairs. His works, published posthumously, were available (in accordance with the Christian spirit of Fedorov's philosophy) only free of charge from the publisher, who renounced all rights.

2. Philosophy

Due to his Christian perspective, Fedorov found the widespread lack of love among people appalling. He divided these non-loving relations into two kinds. One is alienation among people: "non-kindred relations of people among themselves." The other is isolation of the living from the dead: "nature's non-kindred relation to men." "[O]ne should live not for oneself nor for others but with all and for all" (Filosofiya Obshchago Dela vol. I, 118, n. 5, as quoted in Zakydalsky, 55). Fedorov is referring to all people of all time (past, present, future). He is speaking of a project to unite humankind, the colonization ("spiritualization") of the universe, the quest for the Kingdom of God, the creation of cosmos from chaos, the death of death, even resurrection of the dead. Fedorov believed, and passionately felt, that resignation in the face of death and separation of knowledge from action was false Christianity. He cautioned against being fooled into worshipping the blind forces of Satan. Rather, one should actively participate in changing what is into what ought to be.

The division between the learned and the unlearned was, in Fedorov's view, worse than the separation of the rich and the poor. The unlearned are more concerned with work than thought. The learned (philosophers and scientists) are less concerned with work than thought. The learned seem unaware that ideas "are not subjective, nor are they objective; they are projective." Philosophers and scientists, because they have separated ideas from moral action, are simply slaves to the imperfect present order. It is a root dogma of the learned that paradise is not possible. The unlearned should demand that the learned (because only they have the necessary knowledge) become a temporary task force for the Kingdom of God. The learned, however, will attempt to persuade us that problems like crop failures, disease, and death are not general questions but matters for a narrow discipline, questions for only a very small (or nonexistent) minority of the learned. Separation of the learned from the masses turns them into a seemingly permanent class, producing non-lovers of humankind. The "transformation of the blind course of nature into one that is rational ... is bound to appear to the learned as a disruption of order, although this order of theirs brings only disorder among men, striking them down with famine, plague, and death."

A citizen, a comrade, or a team-member can be replaced by another. However a person loved, one's kin, is irreplaceable. Moreover, memory of one's dead kin is not the same as the real person. Pride in one's forefathers is a vice, a form of egotism. On the other hand, love of one's forefathers means sadness in their death, requiring the literal raising of the dead. Politics must be replaced by physics. The politics of egoism and altruism must be replaced by Christianity which "knows only all men." Pride is a Tower of Babel that separates us from one another. Love is a "fusion as opposed to a confusion." For Fedorov, "complete and universal salvation" is preferable to "incomplete or non-universal salvation in which some men -- the sinners -- are condemned to eternal torments and others -- the righteous -- to an eternal contemplation of these torments." That is to say, Fedorov's bold science project, "the common task," is not the only possible route to salvation. "Salvation may also occur without the participation of men ... if they do not unite in the common task"; "if we do not unite to accomplish our salvation, if we do not accept the Gospel message," then a "purely transcendent resurrection will save only the elect; for the rest it will be an expression of God's wrath," "eternal punishment." "I believe this literally." "Christianity has not fully saved the world, because it has not been fully assimilated." Christianity "is not simply a doctrine of redemption, but the very task of redemption."

Fedorov's thoughts have been variously described as bold, culminating, curious, easily-misunderstood, extreme, hazy, idealist, naive, of-value, scientifico-magical, special, unexpected, unique, and utopian. Many of the small number of philosophers familiar with Fedorov admit his originality, his independence, his human concern, perhaps even his logic -- up to a point. But his resurrection project is viewed with understandable skepticism and often dismissed as an impossible fantasy. Interestingly, the harshest criticism has come from Christian thinkers such as Florovsky and Ustryalov whose objections bear religious overtones; some materialists such as Muravyov and Setnitsky have been quite benign and favorable by comparison. Perhaps all would agree, however, on Fedorov's single-mindedness. Looked at positively, this is simply another term for purity-of-heart, a quality of saintliness. With his strong emphasis on kinship and brotherhood demanding, ultimately, a world in which all must mutually benefit, Fedorov perhaps anticipates Rawls who says: "Thus what we are doing is to combine into one conception the totality of conditions that we are ready upon due reflection to recognize as reasonable in our conduct with regard to one another. ... all persons ... even ... persons who are not contemporaries but who belong to many generations. Thus to see our place in society from the perspective of this position is ... to regard the human situation not only from all social but also from all temporal points of view. The perspective of eternity is not a perspective from a certain place beyond the world, nor the point of view of a transcendent being; rather it is a certain form of thought and feeling that rational persons can adopt within the world. ... Purity of heart, if one could attain it, would be to see clearly and to act with grace and self-command from this point of view." Fedorov wrote: "By refusing to grant ourselves the right to set ourselves apart ... we are kept from setting any goal for ourselves that is not the common task of all." But Fedorov's thought soars beyond the present world to a world of its own, in his insistence that we can become immortal and godlike through rational efforts, and that our moral obligation is to create a heaven to be shared by all who ever lived. "[D]eath is merely the result or manifestation of our infantilism, lack of independence and self-reliance, and of our incapacity for mutual support and the restoration of life. People are still minors, half-beings, whereas the fullness of personal existence, personal perfection, is possible. However, it is possible only within general perfection. Coming of age will bring perfect health and immortality, but for the living [living contemporaries of Fedorov] immortality is impossible without the resurrection of the dead"(What Was Man Created For?, 76).

3. Further Reading

(Collected Works in Russian)

  • Fedorov, N. F. Filosofiya Obshchago Dela: Stat'i, Mysli, i Pis'ma Nikolaia Fedorovicha Fedorova, ed. V. A. Kozhevnikov and N. P. Peterson, 2 vols. originally published by Fedorov's friends and followers after his death, 1906, 1913; reprint London: Gregg Press, 1970.
  • Fedorov, N. F. Sobranie Sochineniy, 4 vols. + supp. Moscow: Traditsiya, 2000.

(Works in English)

  • Berdyaev, N. A. "N. F. Fyodorov." The Russian Review 9 (1950) 124-130.
    • Fedorov's thought was not without influence on Berdyaev's existentialism.
  • Berdyaev, N. A. The Russian Idea. New York: Macmillan Co., 1948.
    • Fedorov and other original Russian thinkers are discussed.
  • Fedorov, N. F. "The Question of Brotherhood or Kinship, of the Reasons for the Unbrotherly, Unkindred, or Unpeaceful State of the World, and of the Means for the Restoration of Kinship" in Edie, J. M.; Scanlan, J. P.; Zeldin, M.; and Kline, G. L., eds. Russian Philosophy. Chicago: Quadrangle Books, 1965. 16-54.
    • This is one place to begin if you want to read Fedorov directly (in English translation).
  • Fedorov, N. F. What Was Man Created For? The Philosophy of the Common Task: Selected Works. Koutiassov, E.; and Minto, M., eds. Lausanne, Switzerland: Honeyglen/L'Age d'Homme, 1990.
    • A good source of Fedorov in English translation; includes a list of Russian language works in the bibliography.
  • Lossky, N. O. History of Russian Philosophy. New York: International Universities Press, 1951.
    • Fedorov is included in this history.
  • Lukashevich, S. N. F. Fedorov (1828-1903): A Study in Russian Eupsychian and Utopian Thought. Newark: University of Delaware Press, 1977.
    • The methodology used in this study may not insure full appreciation of Fedorov's thought, but it does demonstrate that his thought was indeed a detailed, coherent philosophy in which the various pieces fit together.
  • Schmemann, A., ed. Ultimate Questions: An Anthology of Modern Russian Religious Thought. New York: Holt, Rinehart and Winston, 1965; reprint Crestwood, NY: St. Vladimir's Seminary Press, 1977.
    • Selections (translations) from Russian religious thinkers, including Fedorov, concerned with eschatology or other "ultimate" questions. The Fedorov material is from vol. 1 of Filosofiya Obshchago Dela and deals with "the restoration of kinship among mankind."
  • Soloviov, M. "The 'Russian Trace' in the History of Cryonics," Cryonics 16:4 (4th Quarter, 1995) 20-23.
    • Closing paragraph describes author's then-current (post-cold-war) and perhaps unprecedented efforts promoting cryonics and immortalism in the former Soviet Union; the article itself acknowledges a debt to Fedorov.
  • Young, G. M. Nikolai F. Fedorov: An Introduction. Belmont, Mass.: Nordland Publishing Co., 1979.
    • Not only an excellent introduction, but a mine of references and information inviting further Fedorovian research, including Russian language works, many of which are not yet translated (or not fully translated) into English.
  • Zakydalsky, T. D. N. F. Fyodorov's Philosophy of Physical Resurrection. Ann Arbor, Mich.: UMI, 1976.
    • A Ph.D. dissertation (Bryn Mawr) of 531 pages. Bibliography has a list of Russian language works.
  • Zenkovsky, V. V. A History of Russian Philosophy. New York: Columbia University Press, 1953.
    • Fedorov is included in this history.

Author Information

Charles Tandy
Ria University
U. S. A.

R. Michael Perry
U. S. A.

Benedict De Spinoza (1632—1677)

spinozaBenedict de Spinoza  was among the most important of the post-Cartesian philosophers who flourished in the second half of the 17th century. He made significant contributions in virtually every area of philosophy, and his writings reveal the influence of such divergent sources as Stoicism, Jewish Rationalism, Machiavelli, Hobbes, Descartes, and a variety of heterodox religious thinkers of his day. For this reason he is difficult to categorize, though he is usually counted, along with Descartes and Leibniz, as one of the three major Rationalists. Given Spinoza’s devaluation of sense perception as a means of acquiring knowledge, his description of a purely intellectual form of cognition, and his idealization of geometry as a model for philosophy, this categorization is fair. But it should not blind us to the eclecticism of his pursuits, nor to the striking originality of his thought.

Among philosophers, Spinoza is best known for his Ethics, a monumental work that presents an ethical vision unfolding out of a monistic metaphysics in which God and Nature are identified. God is no longer the transcendent creator of the universe who rules it via providence, but Nature itself, understood as an infinite, necessary, and fully deterministic system of which humans are a part. Humans find happiness only through a rational understanding of this system and their place within it. On account of this and the many other provocative positions he advocates, Spinoza has remained an enormously controversial figure. For many, he is the harbinger of enlightened modernity who calls us to live by the guidance of reason. For others, he is the enemy of the traditions that sustain us and the denier of what is noble within us. After a review of Spinoza’s life and works, this article examines the main themes of his philosophy, primarily as they are set forth in the Ethics.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Works
  2. Geometric Method and the Ethics
  3. Metaphysics
    1. Substance Monism
      1. Definitions
      2. Preliminary Propositions
      3. Substance Monism Demonstrated
    2. The Modal System
      1. Natura naturans and Natura naturata
      2. Two Types of Mode
      3. Causal Determinism
      4. Causal Parallelism
  4. Mind and Cognition
    1. The Mind as the Idea of the Body
    2. Imagination
      1. Sense Perception
    3. Inadequate Ideas
    4. Adequate Ideas
    5. Three Kinds of Knowledge
  5. Psychology
    1. Rejection of Free-Will
    2. The Conatus Principle
    3. The Affects
    4. Bondage
  6. Ethics
    1. Freedom from the Passions
    2. Conatus and the Guidance of Reason
    3. Knowledge of God as the Highest Good
    4. Intellectual Love of God and Human Blessedness
    5. Eternity of the Mind
    6. Conclusion
  7. References and Further Reading
    1. Texts and Translations of Spinoza
    2. General Studies Suitable as Introductions
    3. More Advanced and Specialized Studies
    4. Collected Essays on Spinoza

1. Life and Works

Spinoza came into the world a Jew. Born in 1632, he was the son of Marrano parents. They had immigrated to Amsterdam from Portugal in order to escape the Inquisition that had spread across the Iberian Peninsula and live in the relatively tolerant atmosphere of Holland. Spinoza's father, Michael, was a successful merchant and a respected member of the community. His mother, Hanna, the second of Michael's three wives, died in 1638, just before Spinoza was to turn six.

The young Spinoza, given the name Baruch, was educated in his congregation's academy, the Talmud Torah school. There he received the kind of education that the community deemed necessary to constitute one as an educated Jew. This largely consisted of religious study , including instruction in Hebrew, liturgy, Torah, prophetic writings, and rabbinical commentaries. Although Spinoza no doubt excelled in these, he did not move on to the higher levels of study which focused on the Talmud and were typically undertaken by those preparing for the rabbinate. Whether by desire or by necessity, Spinoza left the school in order to work in his father's business, which he eventually took over with his half-brother, Gabriel.

The Jewish community in Amsterdam was by no means a closed one , but Spinoza's commercial activities put him in touch with more diverse currents of thought than those to which he had hitherto been exposed. Most significantly, he came into contact with so-called 'free-thinking' Protestants - dissenters from the dominant Calvinism – who maintained a lively interest in a wide range of theological issues, as well as in the latest developments in philosophy and science. This naturally included the work of Descartes, which was regarded by many in Holland to be the most promising of several alternatives to scholasticism that had emerged in recent decades. In order to discuss their interests, these free-thinkers organized themselves into small groups, they called colleges, which met on a regular basis. Spinoza may have attended such meetings as early as the first half of the 1650's, and it is most likely here that he received his first exposure to Cartesian thought.

This is not to say that Spinoza ceased to mine the resources of his own tradition - he became steeped, for example, in the writings of such philosophically important figures as Maimonides and Gersonides - but his intellectual horizons were expanding and he was experiencing a restlessness that drove him to look further afield. It was at this time that he placed himself under the tutelage of an ex-Jesuit, Franciscus Van den Enden, who had recently set up a Latin school in Amsterdam. Van den Enden turned out to be the perfect teacher for Spinoza. In addition to having an excellent reputation as a Latinist, he was a medical doctor who kept abreast of all that was new in the sciences. He was also notorious for his allegedly irreligious cast of mind, and he was a passionate advocate of democratic political ideals. It is safe to say that Spinoza's studies with Van den Enden included more than lessons on how to decline nouns.

Spinoza's intellectual reorientation, however, came at a cost . His increasingly unorthodox views and, perhaps, laxity in his observance of the Jewish law strained his relations with the community. Tensions became so great that, in 1656, the elders of the synagogue undertook proceedings to excommunicate him. Without providing details, the writ of excommunication accuses him of 'abominable heresies' and ‘monstrous deeds’. It then levels a series of curses against him and prohibits others from communicating with him, doing business with him, reading anything he might write, or even coming into close proximity with him. Spinoza may still have been a Jew, but he was now an outcast.

Little is known about Spinoza's activities in the years immediately following his excommunication. He continued his studies with Van den Enden and occasionally took up residence in his teacher's home. As it was now impossible for him to carry on in commerce, it was most likely at this time that he took up lens grinding as an occupation. There is also evidence that he traveled periodically to Leiden to study at the university. There he would have received formal instruction in Cartesian philosophy and become familiar with the work of prominent Dutch Cartesians. In 1661, he settled near Leiden, in the town of Rijnsburg.

It was during this same period, in the late 1650's, that Spinoza embarked upon his literary career. His first work, the Treatise on the Emendation of the Intellect, is an attempt to formulate a philosophical method that would allow the mind to form the clear and distinct ideas that are necessary for its perfection. It contains, in addition, reflection upon the various kinds of knowledge, an extended treatment of definition, and a lengthy analysis of the nature and causes of doubt. For reasons that are unknown, theTreatise was left unfinished, though it appears that Spinoza always intended to complete it. Shortly thereafter, while in Rijnsburg, Spinoza set to work on his Short Treatise on God, Man, and His Well-Being. This work, circulated privately among friends, foreshadows many of the themes of his mature work, the Ethics. Most notably, it contains an unambiguous statement of the most famous of Spinoza's theses - the identity of God and Nature.

Spinoza's stay in Rijnsburg was brief. In 1663 he moved to the town of Voorburg, not far from The Hague, where he settled into a quiet, but busy, life. At the behest of friends, he immediately set about preparing for publication a set of lessons that he had given to a student in Leiden on Descartes'sPrinciples of Philosophy. The result was the only work that he was to publish under his own name, now Latinized to Benedict: René Descartes's Principles of Philosophy, Parts I and II, Demonstrated According to the Geometric Method by Benedict de Spinoza of Amsterdam. As a condition of publication, Spinoza had his friend, Lodewijk Meyer, write a preface to the work, warning the reader that his aim was exposition only and that he did not endorse all of Descartes's conclusions. He also appended a short piece, entitled Metaphysical Thoughts, in which he sketched some of his own views. Despite his admiration for Descartes, Spinoza did not want to be seen as a Cartesian.

Spinoza's work on Descartes shows him to have been interested from early on in the use of geometric method in philosophy. In addition to putting parts of the Principles into geometric form, he began experimenting with geometric demonstrations of material taken from his own Short Treatise. It was out of this experimentation that the idea arose for a fully geometric presentation of his thought. He began work on this sometime in the early 1660's, and by 1665 substantial portions of what was to become theEthics were circulating in draft form among his friends back in Amsterdam. Though he was well into the project by then, the political and religious climate of the day made Spinoza hesitant to complete it . He chose to exercise caution and suspended work on it, turning instead to a book that would prepare an audience receptive to the Ethics. This was the Theological-Political Treatise, which he completed and published anonymously in 1670.

Spinoza's aim in the Theological-Political Treatise was to argue that the stability and security of society is not undermined but, rather, enhanced by freedom of thought, meaning primarily the freedom to philosophize. As is clear from the text, he considered the primary threat to this freedom emanated from the clergy, whom he accused of playing upon the fears and superstitions of people in order to maintain power. His solution was to divest the clergy of all political power, even to the point of placing authority over the practice of religion in the hands of the sovereign. The sovereign, Spinoza argued, should extend broad liberties within this domain, requiring adherence to no more than a minimal creed that was neutral with respect to competing sects and the meaning of which was open to a variety of interpretations. This, he hoped, would allow philosophers the freedom to do their work unencumbered by the constraints of sectarianism.

As was to be expected, the Theological-Political Treatise was met with a firestorm of criticism. It was condemned as a work of evil, and its author was accused of having nefarious intentions in writing it. Even some of Spinoza's closest friends were deeply unsettled by it. Though he had assiduously tried to avoid it, Spinoza found himself embroiled in heated religious controversy and saddled with a reputation for atheism, something he greatly resented.

Spinoza's last move, in 1670, was to The Hague, where he was to live out his remaining years. Besides having to deal with fallout from his Theological-Political Treatise, he witnessed a political revolution that culminated in the murder of the Grand Pensionary of Holland, Jan De Witt, along with his brother, Cornelius, by an angry mob of Orangist-Calvinists. Spinoza admired De Witt for his liberal policies and was horrified at the murder. With the ascent of the Orangist-Calvinist faction, he felt his own situation to be tenuous.

Despite these distractions, Spinoza pressed on. He undertook new projects, including the writing of a Hebrew grammar, and he turned back to work on the Ethics. Given the hostility with which theTheological-Political Treatise was met and the realities of the new political landscape, he must have done so with a deep sense of pessimism about its chances for success. By 1675 it was complete. As he perceived his enemies to have grown in influence and opportunity, however, Spinoza decided against publishing it. Public viewing of the definitive statement of his philosophy would have to wait until after his death.

By this time Spinoza was in a state of failing health. Weakened by a respiratory illness, he devoted the last year of his life to writing a work of political philosophy, his Political Treatise. Though left unfinished at his death, Spinoza's intention was to show how governments of all types could be improved and to argue for the superiority of democracy over other forms of political organization. Following the lead of Machiavelli and Hobbes, his argument was to be non-utopian, based on a realistic assessment of human nature drawn from the psychological theory set forth in the Ethics. In the part he did finish, Spinoza showed himself to be an astute analyst of diverse constitutional forms and an original thinker among liberal social contract theorists.

Spinoza died peacefully in his rented room in The Hague in 1677. He left no will, but the manuscripts of his unpublished works - the Treatise on the Emendation of the Intellect, the Ethics, the Hebrew Grammar, and the Political Treatise - along with his correspondence were found in in his desk. These were immediately shipped to Amsterdam for publication, and in short order they appeared in print as B.D.S. Opus Posthuma. But even in death Spinoza could not escape controversy; in 1678, these works were banned throughout Holland.

2. Geometric Method and the Ethics

Upon opening Spinoza's masterpiece, the Ethics, one is immediately struck by its form. It is written in the style of a geometrical treatise, much like Euclid's Elements, with each book comprising a set of definitions, axioms, propositions, scholia, and other features that make up the formal apparatus of geometry. One wonders why Spinoza would have employed this mode of presentation. The effort it required must have been enormous, and the result is a work that only the most dedicated of readers can make their way through.

Some of this is explained by the fact that the seventeenth century was a time in which geometry was enjoying a resurgence of interest and was held in extraordinarily high esteem, especially within the intellectual circles in which Spinoza moved. We may add to this the fact that Spinoza, though not a Cartesian, was an avid student of Descartes's works. As is well known, Descartes was the leading advocate of the use of geometric method within philosophy, and his Meditations was written more geometrico, in the geometrical style. In this respect the Ethics can be said to be Cartesian in inspiration.

While this characterization is true, it needs qualification. The Meditations and the Ethics are very different works, not just in substance, but also in style. In order to understand this difference one must take into account the distinction between two types of geometrical method, the analytic and the synthetic. Descartes explains this distinction as follows:

Analysis shows the true way by means of which the thing in question was discovered methodically and as it were a priori, so that if the reader is willing to follow it and give sufficient attention to all points, he will make the thing his own and understand it just as perfectly as if he had discovered it for himself. . . . . Synthesis, by contrast, employs a directly opposite method where the search is, as it were, a posteriori . . . . It demonstrates the conclusion clearly and employs a long series of definitions, postulates, axioms, theorems and problems, so that if anyone denies one of the conclusions it can be shown at once that it is contained in what has gone before, and hence the reader, however argumentative or stubborn he may be, is compelled to give his assent. (CSM II,110-111)

The analytic method is the way of discovery. Its aim is to lead the mind to the apprehension of primary truths that can serve as the foundation of a discipline. The synthetic method is the way of invention. Its aim is to build up from a set of primary truths a system of results, each of which is fully established on the basis of what has come before. As the Meditations is a work whose explicit aim is to establish the foundations of scientific knowledge, it is appropriate that it employs the analytic method. The Ethics, however, has another aim, one for which the synthetic method is appropriate.

As its title indicates, the Ethics is a work of ethical philosophy. Its ultimate aim is to aid us in the attainment of happiness, which is to be found in the intellectual love of God. This love, according to Spinoza, arises out of the knowledge that we gain of the divine essence insofar as we see how the essences of singular things follow of necessity from it. In view of this, it is easy to see why Spinoza favored the synthetic method. Beginning with propositions concerning God, he was able to employ it to show how all other things can be derived from God. In grasping the order of propositions as they are demonstrated in the Ethics, we thus attain a kind of knowledge that approximates the knowledge that underwrites human happiness. We are, as it were, put on the road towards happiness. Of the two methods it is only the synthetic method that is suitable for this purpose.

3. Metaphysics

Although the Ethics is not principally a work of metaphysics, the system it lays out stands as one of the great monuments in the tradition of grand metaphysical speculation. What is perhaps most noteworthy about this system is that it is a species of monism - the doctrine that all of reality is in some significant sense one. In Spinoza's case, this is exemplified by the claim that there is one and only one substance. This substance he identifies as God. While monism has had its defenders in the west, they have been few and far between. Spinoza is arguably the greatest among them.

a. Substance Monism

Spinoza builds his case for substance monism in a tightly reasoned argument that culminates in IP14. We may best follow the course of this argument by taking it in three parts. First, we examine four definitions that play a crucial role in the argument. Second, we look at two propositions to which the demonstration of IP14 appeals. And third, we turn to the demonstration of IP14 itself.

i. Definitions

Among the eight definitions that open Book One of the Ethics, the following four are most important to the argument for substance monism:

ID3: By substance I understand what is in itself and is conceived through itself, that is, that whose concept does not require the concept of another thing, from which it must be formed.

This definition has two components. First, a substance is what exists in itself. This is to say that it is an ultimate metaphysical subject. While other things may exist as features of a substance, substance does not exist as a feature of anything else. Second, a substance is what is conceived through itself. This is to say that the idea of a substance does not involve the idea of any other thing. Substances are both ontologically and conceptually independent.

ID4: By attribute I understand what the intellect perceives of a substance, as constituting its essence.

An attribute is not just any property of a substance - it is its very essence. So close is the association of an attribute and the substance of which it is an attribute that Spinoza denies that there is a real distinction between them.

ID5: By mode I understand the affections of a substance, or that which is in another through which it is also conceived.

A mode is what exists in another and is conceived through another. Specifically, it exists as a modification or an affection of a substance and cannot be conceived apart from it. In contrast to substances, modes are ontologically and conceptually dependent.

ID6: By God I understand a being absolutely infinite, that is, a substance consisting of an infinity of attributes, of which each one expresses an eternal and infinite essence.

God is an infinite substance. By this Spinoza means both that the number of God's attributes is unlimited and that there is no attribute that God does not possess. As we make our way through the Ethics, we learn that only two of these attributes can be known by the human mind. These are thought and extension.

ii. Preliminary Propositions

Spinoza moves from these definitions to demonstrate a series of propositions concerning substance in general and God in particular on the basis of which he will demonstrate that God is the one and only substance. The following two propositions are landmarks in the overall argument and are explicitly invoked in the demonstration of IP14:

IP5: In Nature there cannot be two or more substances of the same nature or attribute.

In support of this proposition, Spinoza argues that if two or more substances were to exist they would be differentiated either by a difference in modes or by a difference in attributes. However, they could not be differentiated by a difference in modes, for substances are prior in nature to their modes. Thus, they would have to be differentiated by a difference in attributes. Controversially, Spinoza takes this to entail that no two substances can have exactly the same set of attributes, nor can they have a common attribute. Substances must be entirely dissimilar to one another.

IP11: God, or a substance consisting of infinite attributes, each of which expresses eternal and infinite essence, necessarily exists.

In support of this proposition, Spinoza offers a variant of the so-called Ontological Argument. The basic consideration upon which this variant rests is that it pertains to the nature of substance to exist. Spinoza establishes this earlier, in IP7, by appealing to the fact that substances, being entirely dissimilar to one another, cannot produce one another. Since nothing else can produce a substance, substances must be self-caused, which is to say that it pertains to the nature of substance to exist. To imagine that God does not exist is thus absurd. As a substance consisting of infinite attributes, it pertains to the divine nature to exist.

iii. Substance Monism Demonstrated

With these propositions in place, Spinoza has everything he needs to demonstrate that there is one and only one substance and that this substance is God:

IP14: Except God, no substance can be or be conceived.

The demonstration of this proposition is exceedingly simple. God exists (by IP11). Since God possesses every attribute (by ID6), if any substance other than God were to exist, it would possess an attribute in common with God. But, since there cannot be two or more substances with a common attribute (by IP5), there can be no substance other than God. God is the one and only substance.

The implications of this proposition are startling, and Spinoza can be seen to be working them out through the remainder of the Ethics. Most obviously, this proposition marks a break with the substance pluralism advocated by the majority of philosophers in the west. Even Descartes, from whom Spinoza learned much in the area of metaphysics, posited a plurality of mental and physical substances, along with God, whom he regarded as the paradigm of a substance. More importantly, it signals a rejection of classical theism, the idea that God is the creator of the universe who remains ontologically distinct from it and governs it according to his sovereign will. Spinoza has nothing but scorn for this idea and dismisses it as a product of the imagination. How it is that he reconceptualizes the relation between God, the infinite substance, and the order of finite things, becomes clear only as we turn to his account of the modal system.

b. The Modal System

In line with his rejection of classical theism, Spinoza famously identifies God with Nature. Nature is no longer seen as a power that is distinct from and subordinate to God, but as a power that is one and the same with divine power. Spinoza's phrase 'Deus sive Natura’ (‘God or Nature’) captures this identification and is justly celebrated as a succinct expression of his metaphysics. In isolation, however, the phrase is relatively uninformative. It tells us nothing about how Spinoza, having rejected the creator/creation relation posited by the classical model, conceives of the relation between God and the system of modes.

i. Natura naturans and Natura naturata

To fill out his thoughts on this matter, Spinoza distinguishes between Nature taken in its active or productive aspect, which he identifies with God or the divine attributes, and Nature taken in its derivative or produced aspect, which he identifies with the system of modes. The former he calls Natura naturans(literally: Nature naturing) and the latter he calls Natura naturata (literally: Natura natured). Spinoza's use of these formulas is revealing in two respects. First, his double employment of 'Natura' signals the ontological unity that exists between God and the system of modes. Each mode within the system is a modification of nothing other than the very substance that is God. Second, his employment of the active 'naturans' in the first and the passive 'naturata' in the second signals a causal relation between God and the modal system. God is not merely the subject of modes; he is an active power that produces and sustains them.

In view of the ontological unity that exists between God and the modal system, Spinoza is careful to specify that the divine causality is immanent rather that transitive. What this means is that God's causal activity does not pass outside of the divine substance to produce external effects, as it would if God were a creator in the traditional sense. Rather, it remains wholly within the divine substance to produce the multitude of modes that constitute the modal system. Spinoza likens this to the way in which the nature of a triangle is productive of its own essential properties: "From God's supreme power, or infinite nature, infinitely many things in infinitely many modes, that is, all things, have necessarily flowed, or always follow, by the same necessity and in the same way as from the nature of a triangle it follows, from eternity and to eternity, that its three angles are equal to two right angles" (IP17S1). The entire modal system, Natura naturata, follows immanently from the divine nature, Natura naturans.

ii. Two Types of Mode

Into this relatively simple picture, Spinoza introduces a complication. There are, he says, two types of mode. The first consists in what he calls infinite and eternal modes. These are pervasive features of the universe, each of which follows from the divine nature insofar as it follows from the absolute nature of one or another of God's attributes. Examples include motion and rest under the attribute of extension and infinite intellect under the attribute of thought. The second consists in what may be called finite and temporal modes, which are simply the singular things that populate the universe. Modes of this type follow from the divine nature as well, but do so only as each follows from one or another of God's attributes insofar as it is modified by a modification that is itself finite and temporal. Examples include individual bodies under the attribute of extension and individual ideas under the attribute of thought.

Unfortunately, Spinoza does little to explain either what these infinite and eternal modes are or what relation they have to finite and temporal modes. Taking their cue from a statement in the Treatise on the Emendation of the Intellect that the laws of nature are embedded in the infinite and eternal modes, many commentators have suggested that Spinoza thought of these modes as governing the manner in which finite modes affect one another. For example, if laws of impact are somehow embedded in the infinite and eternal mode motion and rest, then the outcome of any particular collision will be determined by that mode together with the relevant properties (speed, direction, size, etc) of the bodies involved. If this is correct, then Spinoza envisions every finite mode to be fully determined by intersecting lines of causality: a horizontal line that stretches back through the series of antecedent finite modes and a vertical line that moves up through the series of infinite modes and terminates in one or another of the attributes of God.

iii. Causal Determinism

However it may be that Spinoza ultimately conceives of the relation between infinite and finite modes, he is clear about one thing - the system of modes is an entirely deterministic system in which everything is fully determined to be and to act:

IP29: In nature there is nothing contingent, but all things have been determined from the necessity of the divine nature to exist and produce an effect in a certain way.

Spinoza reminds us that God's existence is necessary. It pertains to the very nature of substance to exist. Furthermore, since each and every mode follows from the necessity of the divine nature, either from the absolute nature of one or another of God's attributes, as is the case with the infinite and eternal modes, or from one or another of God's attributes insofar as it is modified by a modification that is finite, as is the case with the finite modes, they are all necessary as well. Since there is nothing other than the divine substance and its modes, there is nothing that is contingent. Any appearance of contingency is the result of a defect in knowledge, either of God or of the order of causes. Accordingly, Spinoza makes it central to his theory of knowledge that to know a thing adequately is to know it in its necessity, as it has been fully determined by its causes.

iv. Causal Parallelism

An obvious question to ask at this point is whether it is possible for finite modes falling under one attribute to act upon and determine finite modes falling under another attribute. Spinoza's answer is an unambiguous no. Causal relations exist only among modes falling under the same attribute. His explanation for this may be traced back to an axiom set forth at the beginning of Book One:

IA4: The knowledge of an effect depends on, and involves, the knowledge of its cause.

Given this axiom, if a finite mode falling under one attribute were to have God as its cause insofar as he is considered under a different attribute, i.e., if it were to be caused by a finite mode falling under a different attribute, then the knowledge of that mode would involve the knowledge of that other attribute. Since it does not, that mode cannot have God as its cause insofar as he is considered under some other attribute. In other words, it cannot be caused by a finite mode falling under some other attribute.

When applied to modes falling under those attributes of which we have knowledge - thought and extension – this has an enormously important consequence. There can be no causal interaction between ideas and bodies. This does not mean that ideas and bodies are unrelated to one another. Indeed, it is one of the best-known theses in the Ethics that the lines of causation that run among them are strictly parallel:

IIP7: The order and connection of ideas is the same as the order and connection of things.

In the demonstration of this proposition Spinoza says that it is a consequence of IA4 and leaves it at that. Nevertheless, it is apparent that this proposition has deep foundations in his substance monism. As thought and extension are not attributes of distinct substances, so ideas and bodies are not modes of distinct substances. They are "one and the same thing, but expressed two ways" (IIP7S). If ideas and bodies are one and the same thing, however, their order and connection must be the same. The doctrine of substance monism in this way insures that ideas and bodies, though causally independent, are causally parallel.

4. Mind and Cognition

It is at this point that Spinoza's metaphysics touches upon his theory of mind and yields some of its most profound consequences. Most obviously, substance monism prohibits him from affirming the kind of dualism that Descartes affirmed, one in which mind and body are conceived as distinct substances. What is more, his contention that modes falling under different attributes have no causal interaction but are causally parallel to one another prohibits him from affirming that mind and body interact. Because he takes seriously the reality of the mental while rejecting dualism and eliminating interaction, Spinoza's views on the mind are generally given a sympathetic hearing in a way that Descartes's views are not.

a. The Mind as the Idea of the Body

To understand Spinoza's account of the mind we must begin with IIP7. This proposition, together with its scholium, commits him to the thesis that for each finite mode of extension there exists a finite mode of thought that corresponds to it and from which it is not really distinct. More elaborately, it commits him to the thesis that (1) for each simple body there exists a simple idea that corresponds to it and from which it is not really distinct and (2) for each composite body there exists a composite idea that corresponds to it and from which it is not really distinct, composed, as it were, of ideas corresponding to each of the bodies of which the composite body is composed. Spinoza counts all of these ideas, whether simple or composite, as minds. In this respect he does not consider the human mind to be unique. It is simply the idea that corresponds to the human body.

In taking this position, Spinoza does not mean to imply that all minds are alike. As minds are expressions of the bodies to which they correspond in the domain of thought, some have abilities that others do not. Simply put, the greater the capacity of a body for acting and being acted upon, the greater the capacity of the mind that corresponds to it for perception. Spinoza elaborates:

[I]n proportion as a body is more capable than others of doing many things at once, or being acted on in many ways at once, so its mind is more capable than others of perceiving many things at once. And in proportion as the actions of a body depend more on itself alone, and as other bodies concur with it less in acting, so its mind is more capable of understanding distinctly. And from these [truths] we know the excellence of one mind over the others. (IIP13S)

Herein lies the explanation of the excellence of the human mind. The human body, as a highly complex composite of many simple bodies, is able to act and be acted upon in myriad ways that other bodies cannot. The human mind, as an expression of that body in the domain of thought, mirrors the body in being a highly complex composite of many simple ideas and is thus possessed of perceptual capacities exceeding those of other, non-human minds. Only a mind that corresponds to a body of complexity comparable to that of the human body can have perceptual abilities comparable to those of the human mind.

b. Imagination

A perceptual ability that is of particular interest to Spinoza is imagination. This he takes to be a general capacity of representing external bodies as present, whether they are actually present or not. Imagination thus includes more than the capacity to form those mental constructs that we normally consider to be imaginative. It includes memory and sense perception as well. Since it is clearly impossible to get around in the world without this, Spinoza concedes that it is "in this way [that] I know almost all the things that are useful in life" (TIE 22).

That being said, Spinoza consistently opposes imagination to intellect and views it as providing no more than confused perception. To use his preferred terminology, the ideas of the imagination are inadequate. They may be essential for getting around in the world, but they give us a distorted and incomplete picture of the things in it. To understand why, it is useful to begin with sense perception. This is the most important form of imaginative perception, and it is from this form that all others derive.

i. Sense Perception

On Spinoza's account, sense perception has its origin in the action of an external body upon one or another of the sensory organs of one's own body. From this there arises a complex series of changes in what amounts to the body’s nervous system. As the mind is the idea of the body, it will represent these changes. This, Spinoza contends, is what constitutes sense perception.

In order to explain how this act of representation yields perception of an external body, Spinoza appeals to the fact that the changed state of one's body is a function both of the nature of one’s body and the nature of the external body that caused that state. Because of this, the mind's representation of that state will express something more than the nature of one's own body. It will express the nature of the external body as well:

IIP16: The idea of any mode in which the human body is affected by external bodies must involve the nature of the human body and at the same time the nature of the external body.

It is this feature of the mind's act of representation - that it expresses the nature of an external body – that explains how such an act constitutes sense perception.

c. Inadequate Ideas

In view of this it is not difficult to see why Spinoza judges sense perception to be inadequate. Grounded as it is in the mind's representation of the state of one’s own body rather than in the direct representation of external bodies, sense perception is indirect. Since this goes for all imaginative ideas, the problem with them all is the same:

IIP16C2: It follows, second, that the ideas which we have of external bodies indicate the condition of our own body more than the nature of the external bodies.

It is because of this that Spinoza refers to the ideas of the imagination as confused. The vision they give of external bodies is unavoidably colored, so to speak, by the lens of one's own body.

Confusion, however, is just one aspect of the inadequacy of imaginative ideas. Such ideas are also mutilated. The reason for this lies in IA4, which states that the knowledge of an effect depends upon and involves the knowledge of its causes. This is a condition that imaginative ideas can never satisfy. The mind may contain the idea of an external body, but it cannot contain ideas of all of the causes of that body. These, being infinite, fall outside of its scope and are fully contained only in God's infinite intellect. God’s ideas of bodies may be adequate, but ours are not. They are cut off from those ideas that are necessary in order to render them adequate.

d. Adequate Ideas

Although imaginative ideas of external bodies are the most important examples of inadequate ideas, they are not the only examples. Spinoza goes on to show that the mind's ideas of the body, its duration, and its parts are all inadequate. So too is the mind's idea of itself. Even so, he remains optimistic about the possibility of adequate ideas.

This optimism becomes evident as Spinoza shifts his attention from imaginative ideas of singular things to intellectual ideas of common things. These common things are things that are either common to all bodies or common to the human body and certain bodies by which the human body is regularly affected. Spinoza tells us little else about these common things, except to say that they are fully present in the whole and in each of the parts of every body in which they are present. Nevertheless, it is fairly certain that the class of things common to all bodies includes the attribute of extension and the infinite and eternal mode of motion and rest. What is included in the class of things common to the human body and those bodies by which the human body is regularly affected is not so certain. Whatever they turn out to be, however, Spinoza assures us that our ideas of them can only be adequate.

To see why, consider some thing, A, that is common to the human body and some body by which the human body is affected. A, Spinoza contends, will be fully present in the affection that arises in the human body as a result of the action of the external body, just as it is in the two bodies themselves. As a result, the mind, in possessing the idea of that affection, not only will have the idea of A, but its idea will be neither confused nor mutilated. The mind's idea of A will be adequate.

This result is of utmost importance. Because any idea that follows from an adequate idea is itself adequate, these ideas, appropriately called common notions, can serve as axioms in a deductive system. When working out this system, the mind engages in a fundamentally different kind of cognition than when it engages in any of the various forms of imaginative perception. In all forms of imaginative perception the order of ideas mirrors the order of bodily affections, and this order, depending as it does upon the chance encounters of the body with external bodies, is entirely fortuitous. By contrast, the derivation of adequate ideas from common notions within a deductive system follows a wholly different order. This Spinoza calls the order of reason. The paradigm case is geometry.

e. Three Kinds of Knowledge

With this distinction between adequate and inadequate perception in place, Spinoza introduces a set of further distinctions. He begins with inadequate perception, which he now calls knowledge of the first kind, and divides it into two parts. The first consists of knowledge from random experience (experientia vaga). This is knowledge "from singular things which have been represented to us through the senses in a way which is mutilated, confused, and without order for the intellect"(P40S2). The second consists of knowledge from signs (ex signis), "for example, from the fact that, having heard or read certain words, we recollect things, and form certain ideas of them, like those through which we imagine the things"(P40S2). What links both of these forms of knowledge is that they lack a rational order. It is obvious that knowledge from random experience follows the order of the affections of the human body, but so does knowledge from signs. A Roman who hears the word 'pomum', for instance, will think of an apple, not because there is any rational connection between the word and the object, but only because they have been associated in his or her experience.

When we reach what Spinoza calls the second kind of knowledge, reason (ratio), we have ascended from an inadequate to an adequate perception of things. This type of knowledge is gained "from the fact that we have common notions and adequate ideas of the properties of things" (P40S2). What Spinoza has in mind here is what was just indicated, namely, the formation of adequate ideas of the common properties of things and the movement by way of deductive inference to the formation of adequate ideas of other common properties. Unlike in the case of knowledge of the first kind, this order of ideas is rational.

We might think that in attaining this second kind of knowledge we have attained all that is available to us. However, Spinoza adds a third type, which he regards as superior. He calls this intuitive knowledge (scientia intuitiva) and tells us that it "proceeds from an adequate idea of the formal essence of certain attributes of God to the adequate knowledge of the [formal] essence of things"(P40S2). Unfortunately, Spinoza is once again obscure at a crucial junction, and it is difficult to know what he has in mind here. He seems to be envisioning a type of knowledge that gives insight into the essence of some singular thing together with an understanding of how that essence follows of necessity from the essence of God. Furthermore, the characterization of this kind of knowledge as intuitive indicates that the connection between the individual essence and the essence of God is grasped in a single act of apprehension and is not arrived at by any kind of deductive process. How this is possible is never explained.

Problems of obscurity aside, we can still see something of the ideal at which Spinoza is aiming. Inadequate ideas are incomplete. Through them we perceive things without perceiving the causes that determine them to be, and it is for this reason that we imagine them to be contingent. What Spinoza is offering with the third kind of knowledge is a way of correcting this. It is important to note, however, that he is not proposing that we can have this knowledge with respect to the durational existence of any particular item. As we have already seen, this would require having ideas of all of the temporal causes of a thing, which are infinite. Rather, he is proposing that we can have it with respect to the essence of a singular thing as it follows from the essence of God. To have this kind of knowledge is to understand the thing as necessary rather than contingent. It is, to use Spinoza's famous phrase, to regard it sub quadam specie aeternitatis, under a certain aspect of eternity.

5. Psychology

One of the most interesting but understudied areas of Spinoza's thought is his psychology, the centerpiece of which is his theory of the affects. Spinoza, of course, was not the first philosopher to take an interest in the affects. He had only to look to the work of Descartes and Hobbes in the previous generation and to the work of the Stoics before them to find sustained discussions of the topic. His own work shows that he learned much from these thinkers.

Despite his debts, Spinoza expressed deep dissatisfaction with the views of those who had preceded him. His dissatisfaction reflects the naturalistic orientation that he wished to bring to the subject:

Most of those who have written about the affects, and men's way of living, seem to treat, not of natural things, which follow the common laws of Nature, but of things which are outside Nature. Indeed they seem to conceive man in Nature as a dominion within a dominion. For they believe that man disturbs, rather than follows, the order of Nature, that he has absolute power over his actions, and that he is determined only by himself. (III Preface)

In opposition to what he saw as a tendency on the part of previous philosophers to treat humans as exceptions to the natural order, Spinoza proposes to treat them as subject to the same laws and causal determinants as everything else. What emerges can best be described as a mechanistic theory of the affects.

a. Rejection of Free-Will

In working out this new perspective, the first thing on Spinoza's agenda is to clear away what he sees as the most pervasive confusion that we as humans have about ourselves. This is the belief in free-will. Spinoza has nothing but scorn for this belief and treats it as a delusion that arises from the fact that the ideas we have of our actions are inadequate. "[M]en believe themselves to be free," he writes, “because they are conscious of their own actions and are ignorant of the causes by which they are determined" (IIIP2S). If we were to acquire adequate ideas of our actions, since these would carry with them knowledge of their causes, we would immediately see this belief as the delusion that it is.

Spinoza's position on this matter is quite obviously dictated by the determinism of his metaphysics. The mind, as a finite mode, is fully determined to be and to act by other finite modes. To posit a faculty of will by which it is made autonomous and independent of external causal determinants is to remove it from nature. Spinoza will have none of this. As it is fully part of nature, the mind must be understood according to the same principles that govern all modes.

b. The Conatus Principle

The first and most important of these principles is what has come to be known as the Conatus Principle:

IIIP6: Each thing, as far as it can by its own power, strives to persevere in being.

The correct interpretation of this principle is far from clear, but it appears to posit a kind of existential inertia within modes. Each mode, to the extent of its power, so acts as to resist the destruction or diminution of its being. Spinoza expresses this by saying that each mode has an innate striving (conatus) to persevere in being. This striving is so central to what a mode is that he identifies it as a mode's very essence:

IIIP7: The striving by which each thing strives to persevere in its being is nothing but the actual essence of the thing.

Though a bit mysterious as to what it means to say that the striving of a mode is its essence, this identification will play a key role in Spinoza's ethical theory. Among other things, it will provide the basis upon which he can determine what is involved in living by the guidance of reason.

c. The Affects

Spinoza begins his account of the affects with those that result from the action of external causes upon the mind. These are the passive affects, or passions. He identifies three as primary - joy, sadness, and desire – and characterizes all others as involving a combination of one or more of these together with some kind of cognitive state. Love and hate, for example, are joy and sadness coupled with an awareness of their respective causes. Longing, for example, is desire coupled with a memory of the desired object and an awareness of its absence. All remaining passions are characterized in a similar fashion.

Although joy, sadness, and desire are primitive, they are each defined in relation to the mind's striving for perseverance. Joy is that affect by which the mind passes to a greater perfection, understood as an increased power of striving. Sadness is that affect by which the mind passes to a lesser perfection, understood as a decreased power of striving. And desire is the striving for perseverance itself insofar as the mind is conscious of it. Because all passions are derived from these primary affects, the entire passional life of the mind is thus defined in relation to the striving for perseverance.

This may seem paradoxical. Insofar as the mind strives to persevere in being it would appear to be active rather than passive. This is true, but we must realize that the mind strives both insofar as it has adequate ideas and insofar as it has inadequate ideas. The passions are defined only in relation to the mind's striving insofar as it has inadequate ideas. In fact, the passions are themselves a species of inadequate ideas. And since all inadequate ideas are caused from without, so too are the passions. It is in this respect that they must be considered to be passive rather than active.

This, however, is not the case with those affects that are defined in relation to the mind's striving insofar as it has adequate ideas. All such affects, being themselves a species of adequate ideas, are active. Mirroring his analysis of the passions, Spinoza takes two of these as primitive - active joy and active desire – and treats the remainder as derivative. (He does not acknowledge the possibility of an active form of sadness, since the diminishment of the mind's perfection, which is what is involved in sadness, can only occur through the action of external causes.) In doing so, he posits an element within the affective life that is not only active, but, because it is grounded in the mind's striving insofar as it has adequate ideas, is fully rational. It is a central concern of Spinoza's ethical program to maximize this element.

d. Bondage

That Spinoza would wish to maximize the active affects is understandable in light of his characterization of life led under the sway of the passions. Such a life is one in which the individual exercises little effective self-control and is buffeted by external circumstances in ways that are largely random. "The man who is subject to the [passive] affects," Spinoza writes, "is under the control, not of himself, but of fortune, in whose power he so greatly is that often, though he sees the better for himself, he is still forced to follow the worse" (IV Preface). Life under the sway of the passions is a life of bondage.

Unfortunately, the extent to which we can extricate ourselves from the sway of the passions is limited. There are two reasons for this. The first is that the mind is a mode of limited power, yet it is inserted into an order of nature in which there exists an infinite number of modes whose power surpasses its own. To think that the mind can exist unaffected within this order is to assume, falsely, that it is endowed with infinite power or that nothing in nature acts upon it. The second, which is a specification of the first, is that an affect is not restrained merely because it is opposed by reason. It must be opposed by an affect that is stronger than it. The trouble is that reason often lacks this affective power. This is because the strength of the active affects, which pertain to reason, is a function of the strength of the mind alone, whereas the strength of the passive affects, the passions, is a function of the strength of their external causes, which in many cases is greater. In such cases reason is unable to overrule passion and is impotent as a guide. "With this," Spinoza concludes, “I have shown the cause why men are moved more by opinion than by true reason, and why the true knowledge of good and evil arouses disturbances of the mind, and often yields to lust of every kind" (IV17S). Such is the life of bondage.

6. Ethics

It is from this rather pessimistic diagnosis of the human condition that Spinoza's ethical theory takes off. In view of this, it is not at all surprising that his ethics is largely one of liberation, a liberation that is directly tied to the cultivation of reason. In this respect, Spinoza's ethical orientation is much more akin to that of the ancients than to that of his fellow moderns. Like the ancients, he sought not so much to analyze the nature and source of moral duty as to describe the ideal human life. This is the life that is lived by the so-called 'free-man'. It is a life of one who lives by the guidance of reason rather than under the sway of the passions.

a. Freedom from the Passions

In the opening propositions of Book Five, Spinoza lists a number of respects in which the mind, despite its condition of bondage, is able to weaken the hold that the passions have over it. Generally speaking, it is able to do this insofar as it acquires adequate ideas. This, Spinoza tells us, is due to the fact that "the power of the mind is defined by knowledge alone, whereas lack of power, or passion, is judged solely by the privation of knowledge, that is, by that through which ideas are called inadequate" (VP20S). Two examples illustrate this liberating power of adequate ideas.

First, Spinoza claims that the mind is able to form adequate ideas of its affects. It can thus form adequate ideas of the passions, which are themselves inadequate ideas. Since there is no real distinction between an idea and the idea of that idea, those passions of which the mind forms adequate ideas are thereby dissolved.

Second, the effect of a thing upon the mind is lessened to the extent that it is understood to be necessary rather than contingent. We tend, for example, to be saddened less by the loss of a good when we understand that its loss was inevitable. Similarly, we tend to be angered less by another person's actions when we understand that he or she could not have done otherwise. Since adequate ideas present things as necessary rather than as contingent, the acquisition of such ideas thereby lessens their effect upon the mind.

As these examples illustrate, the mind's power over the passions is a function of the adequate ideas that it possess. Liberation lies in the acquisition of knowledge, which empowers the mind and renders it less susceptible to external circumstances. In taking this position, Spinoza places himself in a long tradition that stretches back to the Stoics and ultimately to Socrates.

b. Conatus and the Guidance of Reason

Spinoza tells us that the model human life - the life lived by the 'free-man' – is one that is lived by the guidance of reason rather than under the sway of the passions. This tells us very little, however, unless we know what it is that reason prescribes. In order to make this determination, Spinoza falls back upon the mind's striving for perseverance:

Since reason demands nothing contrary to Nature, it demands that everyone love himself, seek his own advantage, what is really useful to him, want what will really lead a man to greater perfection, and absolutely, that everyone should strive to preserve his own being as far as he can. This, indeed, is as necessarily true as that the whole is greater than its part. (IVP18S)

Reason's prescription is egoistic. We are to act in accordance with our nature. But since our nature is identical to our striving to persevere in being, reason prescribes that we do whatever is to our advantage and seek whatever aids us in our striving. To act this way, Spinoza insists, is to act virtuously.

This does not mean that in living by the guidance of reason we necessarily place ourselves at odds with others. Reason prescribes that individuals seek whatever aids in the striving for perseverance. But since the goods that are necessary in order to persevere in being are attainable only within the context of social life, reason dictates that we act in ways that are conducive to the stability and harmony of society. Spinoza goes so far as to say that in a society in which everyone lives by the guidance of reason, there would be no need of political authority to restrict action. It is only insofar as individuals live under the sway of the passions that they come into conflict with one another and are in need of political authority. Those who live by the guidance of reason understand this and recognize that authority as legitimate.

c. Knowledge of God as the Highest Good

Spinoza's contention that those who live by the guidance of reason will naturally live in harmony with one another receives some support from his view of the highest good for a human. This is the knowledge of God. Since this knowledge can be possessed equally by all who seek it, it can be sought by all without drawing any into conflict.

To establish that the knowledge of God is the highest good, Spinoza again appeals to the fact that the mind's striving is its essence. Since what follows from the mind's essence alone are adequate ideas, this allows him to construe the mind's striving as a striving for adequate ideas. It is a striving for understanding:

IVP26: What we strive for from reason is nothing but understanding; nor does the mind, insofar as it uses reason, judge anything else useful to itself except what leads to understanding.

From here it is but an easy step to show that the knowledge of God is the mind's greatest good. As an infinite substance, God is the greatest thing that can be conceived. Moreover, since everything other than God is a mode of God, and since modes can neither be nor be conceived without the substance of which they are modes, nothing else can be or be conceived apart from God. Spinoza concludes:

IVP28: Knowledge of God is the mind's greatest good: its greatest virtue is to know God.

The knowledge of God is the fulfillment of the mind's striving to persevere in being.

d. Intellectual Love of God and Human Blessedness

In elaborating this thesis, Spinoza specifies this knowledge as knowledge of the third kind. This is the knowledge that proceeds from the adequate idea of one or another of God's attributes to the adequate idea of the formal essence of some singular thing that follows from that attribute. When we possess knowledge of the third kind, we possess adequate perception of God's essence considered not only in itself, but as the immanent causal power of the particular modifications to which it is subject. Knowledge of the first kind, because it is inadequate, and knowledge of the second kind, because it is restricted to the common properties of things, both fail to give us this.

In attaining the third kind of knowledge the mind passes to the highest state of perfection that is available to it. As a result, it experiences active joy to the greatest possible degree. More importantly, since it is by this kind of knowledge that the mind understands God to be the cause of its own perfection, it gives rise to an active love for God as well. This Spinoza refers to as the intellectual love of God. It is the affective correlate to the third kind of knowledge.

The intellectual love of God turns out to have a great many unique properties. Among other things, it is entirely constant, it has no contraries, and it is the very love by which God loves himself. Most significantly, it constitutes the blessedness of the one who possesses it. When such a love dominates one's affective life, one attains the serenity and freedom from passion that is the mark of wisdom. Spinoza thus writes of the person who has attained this love that he "is hardly troubled in spirit, but being, by a certain eternal necessity, conscious of himself, and of God, and of things, he never ceases to be, but always possess true peace of mind" (VP42S). This is human blessedness.

e. Eternity of the Mind

Spinoza's comment that a person who has attained the intellectual love of God "never ceases to be" is perplexing to say the least. It signals a commitment to the view that in some fashion or another the mind, or some part of it, survives the death of the body:

VP23: The human mind cannot be absolutely destroyed with the body, but something of it remains which is eternal.

At first sight, this appears to be in violation of Spinoza's anti-dualist contention that mind and body are one and the same thing conceived under two different attributes. On the basis of this contention, one would expect him to reject the survival of the mind in any fashion. That he asserts it instead has understandably been a source of great controversy among his commentators.

At least some of the problem can be cleared away by taking account of a crucial distinction that Spinoza makes between the existence of the body and its essence. The existence of the body is its actual duration through time. This involves its coming to be, the changes it undergoes within its environment, and its eventual destruction. By contrast, the essence of the body is non-durational. It is grounded in the timeless essence of God, specifically as one among the innumerable particular ways of being extended.

The importance of this distinction lies in the fact that, by appealing to the parallelism doctrine, Spinoza can conclude that there is a corresponding distinction with respect to the mind. There is an aspect of the mind that is the expression of the existence of the body, and there is an aspect of the mind that is the expression of the essence of the body. Spinoza readily concedes that the aspect of the mind that expresses the existence of the body cannot survive the destruction of the body. It is destroyed with the destruction of the body. Such, however, is not the fate of the aspect of the mind that expresses the essence of the body. Like its object, this aspect of the mind is non-durational. Since only what is durational ceases to be, this aspect of the mind is unaffected by the destruction of the body. It is eternal.

Here we must be careful not to misunderstand what Spinoza is saying. In particular, we should not take him to be offering anything approaching a full-blooded doctrine of personal immortality. In fact, he dismisses the belief in personal immortality as arising from confusion: "If we attend to the common opinion of men, we shall see that they are indeed conscious of the eternity of their mind, but that they confuse it with duration, and attribute it to the imagination, or memory, which they believe remains after death" (VP34S). Individuals have some awareness of the eternity of their own minds. But they mistakenly believe that this eternity pertains to the durational aspect of the mind, the imagination. As it is the imagination, inclusive of memory, that constitutes one's unique identity as a person, the belief in personal immortality is similarly mistaken.

None of this is to say that Spinoza's doctrine of the eternity of the mind has no relevance to ethics. Although the imagination is not eternal, the intellect is. And since the intellect is constituted by the mind's store of adequate ideas, the mind is eternal precisely to the extent that it has these ideas. As a consequence, a person whose mind is constituted largely by adequate ideas participates more fully in eternity than a person whose mind is constituted largely by inadequate ideas. So, while Spinoza offers us no hope of personal immortality, we may take consolation in the fact that "death is less harmful to us, the greater the mind's clear and distinct knowledge, and hence, the more the mind loves God" (VP38S).

f. Conclusion

Spinoza does not pretend that any of this is easy. The acquisition of adequate ideas, especially those by which we attain knowledge of the third kind, is difficult, and we can never completely escape the influence of the passions. Nevertheless, Spinoza holds out to those who make the effort the promise, not of personal immortality, but of participation in eternity within this life. He closes the Ethics with these words:

If the way I have shown to lead to these things now seems very hard, still, it can be found. And of course, what is found so rarely must be hard. For if salvation were at hand, and could be found without great effort, how could nearly everyone neglect it? But all things excellent are as difficult as they are rare. (VP42S)

7. References and Further Reading

All passages from the texts of Spinoza are taken from the translations appearing in The Collected Works of Spinoza. Vol.I. Edited and translated by Edwin Curley. (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1985). Passages from the Ethics are cited according to Book (I - V), Definition (D), Axiom (A), Proposition (P), Corollary (C), and Scholium (S). (IVP13S) refers to Ethics, Book IV, Proposition 13, Scholium. Passages from the Treatise on the Emendation of the Intellect are cited according to paragraph number. (TIE 35) refers to Treatise on the Emendation of the Intellect, paragraph 35.

All passages from the texts of Descartes are taken from the translations appearing in The Philosophical Writings of Descartes. 2 Vols. Edited and translated by John Cottingham, Robert Stoothoff & Dugald Murdoch (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1985). Passages are cited according to volume and page number. (CSM II,23) refers to Cottingham, Stoothoff & Murdoch, Volume II, page 23.

a. Texts and Translations of Spinoza

  • Spinoza Opera. 4 Vols. Edited by Carl Gebhart. (Heidelberg: Carl Winter, 1925).
    • Standard critical edition of Spinoza's writings and correspondence in Latin and Dutch.
  • The Collected Works of Spinoza. Vol. I. Edited and translated by Edwin Curley. (Princeton University Press, 1985).
    • First of two volumes (the second is not yet complete) in what, when complete, will become the standard translation into English of Spinoza's writings and correspondence.
  • A Spinoza Reader: The Ethics and Other Works. Edited and translated by Edwin Curley. (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1994).
    • Useful reader that contains the entire text of the Ethics, as well as substantial selections from the Treatise on the Emendation of the Intellect, the Short Treatise, and theTheological-Political Treatise. Also contains helpful selections from Spinoza's correspondence.
  • Baruch Spinoza: The Complete Works. Edited by Michael L. Morgan and translated by Samuel Shirley. (Indianapolis: Hackett, 2002).
    • Only modern translation into English of Spinoza's complete works, including his correspondence.

b. General Studies Suitable as Introductions

  • Allison, Henry. Benedict de Spinoza: An Introduction. (New Haven: Yale UP, 1987).
  • Curley, Edwin. Behind the Geometrical Method. (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1988).
  • Lloyd, Genevieve. Spinoza and the "Ethics". (London: Routledge, 1996).
  • Hampshire, Stuart. Spinoza. (London: Penguin, 1951).
  • Steinberg, Diane, On Spinoza. (Belmont, CA: Wadsworth, 2000).

c. More Advanced and Specialized Studies

  • Bennett, Jonathan. A Study of Spinoza's "Ethics". (Indianapolis: Hackett, 1984).
  • De Dijn, Herman. Spinoza: The Way to Wisdom. (West Lafayette, IN: Purdue University Press, 1996).
  • Della Rocca, Michael. Representation and the Mind-Body Problem in Spinoza. (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1996).
  • Donagan, Alan. Spinoza. (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1988). Curley, Edwin. Spinoza's Metaphysics: An Essay in Interpretation. (Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1969).
  • Delahunty, R.J. Spinoza. (London: Routledge & Kegan Paul, 1985).
  • Lloyd, Genevieve, Part of Nature: Self-Knowledge in Spinoza's Ethics. (Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press, 1994).
  • Mark, Thomas Carson. Spinoza's Theory of Truth. (New York: Columbia University Press, 1972).
  • Mason, Richard. The God of Spinoza: A Philosophical Study. (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1997).
  • Nadler, Steven. Spinoza: A Life. (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1999).
  • Nadler, Steven. Spinoza's Heresy. (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2001).
  • Wolfson, Harry Austryn. The Philosophy of Spinoza. 2 Vols. (Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1934).
  • Woolhouse, R.S. Descartes, Spinoza, Leibniz: The Concept of Substance in Seventeenth Century Metaphysics. (London: Routledge, 1993).
  • Yovel, Yrmiyahu, Spinoza and Other Heretics. Vol.I: The Marrano of Reason; Vol.II: The Adventures of Immanence. (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1989).

d. Collected Essays on Spinoza

  • Chappell, Vere (ed.). Baruch de Spinoza. (New York: Garland Publishing, 1992).
  • Curley, Edwin and Pierre-François Moreau (eds.). Spinoza: Issues and Directions. (Leiden: E.J. Brill, 1990).
  • Freeman, Eugene and Maurice Mandelbaum (eds.). Spinoza: Essays in Interpretation. (LaSalle, IL: Open Court, 1975).
  • Garrett, Don (ed.). The Cambridge Companion to Spinoza. (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996).
  • Grene, Marjorie (ed.). Spinoza: A Collection of Critical Essays. (Garden City, NY: Doubleday/Anchor Press, 1973).
  • Grene, Marjorie and Debra Nails (eds.). Spinoza and the Sciences. (Dordrecht: Reidel, 1986).
  • Kennington, Richard (ed.). The Philosophy of Baruch Spinoza. (Washington DC: Catholic University Press, 1980).
  • Lloyd, Genevieve (ed.). Spinoza Critical Assessments, 4 Vols. (London: Routledge, 2001).
  • Shanan, Robert and J.I. Biro (eds.). Spinoza: New Perspectives. (Norman, OK: University of Oklahoma Press, 1978).

Author Information

Blake D. Dutton
Loyola University Chicago
U. S. A.

Paul Ricoeur (1913—2005)

RicoeurPaul Ricoeur was among the most impressive philosophers of the 20th century continental philosophers, both in the unusual breadth and depth of his philosophical scholarship and in the innovative nature of his thought. He was a prolific writer, and his work is essentially concerned with that grand theme of philosophy: the meaning of life. Ricoeur's "tensive" style focuses on the tensions running through the very structure of human being. His constant preoccupation was with a hermeneutic of the self, fundamental to which is the need we have for our lives to be made intelligible to us. Ricoeur's flagship in this endeavor is his narrative theory. Though a Christian philosopher whose work in theology is well-known and respected, his philosophical writings do not rely upon theological concepts, and are appreciated by non-Christians and Christians alike. His most widely read works are The Rule of Metaphor, From Text to Action, and Oneself As Another, and the three volumes of Time and Narrative. His other significant books include Hermeneutics and the Human Sciences, Conflict of Interpretations, The Symbolism of Evil, Freud and Philosophy, and Freedom and Nature: The Voluntary and the Involuntary.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Works
  2. Style
  3. Influences
  4. The Philosophy
  5. Time and Narrative
  6. Ethics
  7. References and Further Reading
    1. Selected Ricoeur Bibliography
    2. Further Reading

1. Life and Works

Jean Paul Gustave Ricoeur was born on February 27, 1913, at Valence, France, and he died in Chatenay-Malabry, France on May 20, 2005. He lost both his parents within his first few years of his life and was raised with his sister Alice by his paternal grandparents, both of whom were devout Protestants. Ricoeur was a bookish child and successful student. He was awarded a scholarship to study at the Sorbonne in 1934, and afterwards was appointed to his first teaching position at Colmar, Alsace. While at the Sorbonne he first met Gabriel Marcel, who was to become a lifelong friend and philosophical influence. In 1935 he was married to Simone Lejas, with whom he has raised five children.

Ricoeur served in World War II – spending most of it as a prisoner of war – and was awarded the Croix de Guerre. He was interred with Mikel Dufrenne, with whom he later wrote a book on the work of Karl Jaspers. After the war Ricoeur returned to teaching, taking positions at the University of Strasbourg, the Sorbonne, University of Paris at Nanterre, the University of Louvain and University of Chicago. Ricoeur is a traditional philosopher in the sense that his work is highly systematic and steeped in the classics of Western philosophy. His is a reflective philosophy, that is, one that considers the most fundamental philosophical problems to concern self-understanding. While Ricoeur retains subjectivity at the heart of philosophy, his is no abstract Cartesian-style subject; the subject is always a situated subject, an embodied being anchored in a named and dated physical, historical and social world. For this reason his work is sometimes described as philosophical anthropology. Ricoeur is a post-structuralist hermeneutic philosopher who employs a model of textuality as the framework for his analysis of meaning, which extends across writing, speech, art and action. Ricoeur considers human understanding to be cogent only to the extent that it implicitly deploys structures and strategies characteristic of textuality. It is Ricoeur's view that our self-understandings, and indeed history itself , are "fictive", that is, subject to the productive effects of the imagination through interpretation. For Ricoeur, the human subjectivity is primarily linguistically designated and mediated by symbols. He states that the "problematic of existence" is given in language and must be worked out in language and discourse. Ricoeur refers to his hermeneutic method as a "hermeneutics of suspicion" because discourse both reveals and conceals something about the nature of being. Unlike post-structuralists such as Foucault and Derrida, for whom subjectivity is nothing more than an effect of language, Ricoeur anchors subjectivity in the human body and the material world, of which language is a kind of second order articulation. In the face of the fragmentation and alienation of post-modernity, Ricoeur offers his narrative theory as the path to a unified and meaningful life; indeed, to the good life.

2. Style

Ricoeur has developed a theoretical style that can best be described as "tensive". He weaves together heterogeneous concepts and discourses to form a composite discourse in which new meanings are created without diminishing the specificity and difference of the constitutive terms. Ricoeur's work on metaphor and on the human experience of time are perhaps the best examples of this method, although his entire philosophy is explicitly such a discourse. For example, in What Makes Us Think? Ricoeur discusses the nature of mental life in terms of the tension between our neurobiological conceptions of mind and our phenomenological concepts. Similarly, in the essay "Explanation and Understanding" he discusses human behavior in terms of the tension between concepts of material causation, and the language of actions and motives. The tensive style is in keeping with what Ricoeur regards as basic, ontological tensions inherent in the peculiar being that is human existence, namely, the ambiguity of belonging to both the natural world and the world of action (through freedom of the will). Accordingly, Ricoeur insists that philosophy find a way to contain and express those tensions, and so his work ranges across diverse schools of philosophical thought, bringing together insights and analysis from both the Anglo-American and European traditions, as well as from literary studies, political science and history.

The tensions are played out in our ability to take different perspectives on ourselves and so to formulate diverse approaches and methods in understanding ourselves. The different theoretical frameworks employed in philosophy and the sciences are not simply the result of ignorance or power. They are the result of tensions that run through the very structure of human being; tensions which Ricoeur describes as "fault lines." Ricoeur's entire body of work is an attempt to identify and map out the intersections of these numerous and irreducible lines that comprise our understandings of the human world. Ricoeur calls these "fault lines" because they are lines that can intersect in different ways in all the different aspects of human lives, giving lives different meanings. However, as points of intersection of discourses, these meanings can come apart. Ricoeur argues that the stability we enjoy with respect to the meanings of our lives is a tentative stability, subject to the influences of the material world, including the powers and afflictions of one's body, the actions of other people and institutions, and one's own emotional and cognitive states. Given the fundamental nature of these tensions, Ricoeur argues that it is ultimately poetics (exemplified in narrative), rather than philosophy that provides the structures and synthetic strategies by which understanding and a coherent sense of self and life is possible.

3. Influences

Ricoeur acknowledges his indebtedness to several key figures in the tradition, most notably, Aristotle, Kant, Hegel and Heidegger. Aristotelian teleology pervades Ricoeur's textual hermeneutics, and is most obvious in his adoption of a narrative approach. The concepts of "muthos" and "mimesis" in Aristotle's Poetics form the basis for Ricoeur's account of narrative "emplotment," which he enjoins with the innovative powers of the Kantian productive imagination within a general theory of poetics.

The influence of Hegel is manifest in Ricoeur's employment of a method he describes as a "refined dialectic." For Ricoeur, the dialectic is a "relative moment[s] in a complex process called interpretation" (Explanation and Understanding", 150). Like Hegel, the dialectic involves identifying key oppositional terms in a debate, and then proceeding to articulate their synthesis into a new, more developed concept. However, this synthesis does not have the uniformity of a Hegelian synthesis. Ricoeur's method entails showing how the meanings of two seemingly opposed terms are implicitly informed by, and borrow from, each other. Within the dialectic, the terms maintain their differences at the same time that a common "ground" is formed. However, the common ground is simply the ground of their mutual presupposition. Ricoeur's dialectic, then, is a unity of continuity and discontinuity. For example, in "Explanation and Understanding" Ricoeur argues that scientific explanation implicitly deploys a background hermeneutic understanding that exceeds the resources of explanation. At the same time, hermeneutic understanding necessarily relies upon the systematic process of explanation. Neither the natural sciences nor the human sciences are fully autonomous disciplines. A key dialectic that runs through Ricoeur's entire corpus is the dialectic of same and other. This is a foundational dialectic for him, and so, as might be expected, it structures his discussions and dissections of every field of philosophy he enters: selfhood, justice, love, morality, personal identity, knowledge, time, language, metaphor, action, aesthetics, metaphysics, and so on. Unlike the Hegelian dialectic, for Ricoeur, there is no absolute culminating point. There is, nevertheless, a kind of absolute, an objective existence that is revealed indirectly through the dialectic. This is most evident in the third volume of Time and Narrative, where he argues that phenomenological time presupposes an objective order of time (cosmological time), and in The Rule of Metaphor, where he argues that language belongs to, and is expressive of, extra-linguistic reality. Despite this apparent concession to realism, Ricoeur insists that the objective cannot be known as such, but merely grasped indirectly and analytically. Here, the Kantian influence comes to the fore. For Ricoeur, objective reality is the contemporary equivalent of Kantian noumena: although it can never itself become an object of knowledge, it is a kind of necessary thought, a limiting concept, implied in objects of knowledge. This view informs Ricoeur's "tensive" style. Although we can know, philosophically that there is an objective reality, and, in that sense, a metaphysical constraint on human existence, we can never understand human existence simply in terms of this objectivity. What we must appeal to in order to understand our existence are our substantive philosophical and ethical concepts and norms. This sets up an inevitable tension between the contingency of those norms and the brute fact of objective reality, evidenced in our experience of the involuntary, for example, as aging and dying. Again, Kant looms large. We necessarily regard ourselves from two perspectives: as the author of our actions in the practical world, and as part of, or passive to, cause and effect in the natural world. Such is the inherently ambiguous and tensive nature of human, mortal subjects. It is this condition, then, with which philosophy must grapple. And it is to this condition that Ricoeur offers narrative as the appropriate framework.

4. The Philosophy

There are two closely related questions that animate all of Ricoeur's work, and which he considers to be fundamental to philosophy: "Who am I?" and "How should I live?" The first question has been neglected by much of contemporary analytical and post-modern philosophy. Consequently, those philosophies lack the means to address the second question. Postmodernism self-consciously rejects traditional processes of identity formation, depicting them as familial and political power relations premised upon dubious metaphysical assumptions about gender, race and mind. At the same time, contemporary philosophy of mind reduces questions of "who?" to questions of "what?", and in doing so, closes down considerations of self while rendering the moral question one of mere instrumentality or utility. In relation to the question "Who am I?", Ricoeur acknowledges a long-standing debt to Marcel and Heidegger, and to a lesser extent to Merleau-Ponty. To the moral question, the debt is to Aristotle and Kant. In addressing the question "who am I?" Ricoeur sets out first to understand the nature of selfhood – to understand the being whose nature it is to enquire into itself.

In this endeavor, Ricoeur's philosophy is driven by the desire to provide an account that will do justice to the tensions and ambiguities which make us human, and which underpin our fallibility. Ricoeur's interest here can be noted as early as The Voluntary and The Involuntary, drafted during his years as a prisoner of war. There he explores the involuntary constraints to which we are necessarily subject in virtue of our being bodily mortal creatures, and the voluntariness necessary to the idea of ourselves as the agents of our actions. We have, as he later describes it, a "double allegiance", an allegiance to the material world of cause and effect, and to the phenomenal world of the freedom of the will by which we tear ourselves away from the laws of nature through action. This conception of the double nature of the self lies at the core of Ricoeur's philosophy. Ricoeur rejects the idea that a self is a metaphysical entity; there is no entity, "the self," there is only selfhood. Selfhood is an intersubjectively constituted capacity for agency and self-ascription that can be had by individual human beings. Selfhood proper is neither simply an abstract nor an animal self-awareness, but both. It essentially involves an active grasp of oneself as a "who"--that is, as a person who is the subject of a concrete situation, a situation characterized by material and phenomenal qualities. This entails understanding oneself as a named person with a time and place of birth, linked to other similarly named persons and to certain ethnic and cultural traditions, living in a dated and named place. In Oneself As Another Ricoeur describes how the complexity of the question of "who?" opens directly onto a certain way of articulating the question of personal identity: "how the self can be at one and the same time a person of whom we speak and a subject who designates herself in the first person while addressing a second person. . . The difficulty will be . . . understanding how the third person is designated in discourse as someone who designates himself as a first person (34-5)". Drawing on Heidegger's notion of Dasein, Ricoeur goes on to write that "To say self is not to say myself . . . the passage from selfhood to mineness is marked by the clause "in each case" . . . The self . . . is in each case mine" (OAA 180). What he means by this is that each person has to take one's selfhood as one's own; each must take oneself as who one is; one must "attest" to oneself. Subjectivity, or selfhood, is for Ricoeur, a dialectic of activity and passivity because we are beings with a "double nature," structured along the fault lines of the voluntary and the involuntary, beings given to ourselves as something to be known. Ricoeur shares Marcel's view that the answer to the question "Who am I?" can never be fully explicated. This is because, in asking "Who am I?", "I" who pose the question necessarily fall within the domain of enquiry; I am both seeker and what is sought. This peculiar circularity gives a "questing" and dialectical character to selfhood, which now requires a hermeneutic approach. This circularity has its origins in the nature of embodied subjectivity. Ricoeur's account is built upon Marcel's conception of embodied subjectivity as a "fundamental predicament"(Marcel, 1965). The predicament lies in the anti-dualist realization that "I" and my body are not metaphysically distinct entities. My body cannot be abstracted from its being mine. Whatever states I may attribute to my body as its states, I do so only insofar as they are attributes of mine. My body is both something that I am and something that I have: it is "my body" that imagines, perceives and experiences. The unity of "my body" is a unity sui generis. Yet my body is also that over which I exercise a certain instrumentality through my agency. However, the agency that effects that instrumentality is nothing other than "my body." There is no I-body relation; the primitive term here is "my body." The inherent ambiguity of the "carnate body" or "corps-sujet" can be directly experienced by clasping one's own hands (an example often employed by Marcel and Merleau-Ponty). In this experience the distinction between subject and object becomes blurred: it isn't clear which hand is being touched and which is touching; each hand oscillates between the role of agent and object, without ever being both simultaneously. One cannot feel oneself feeling. This example is supposed to demonstrate two points: first, that the ambiguity of my body prevents the complete objectification of myself, and second, that ambiguity extends to all perception. Perception is not simply passive, but rather, involves an active reception (a concept that Ricoeur takes up and develops in his account of the ontology of the self and one's own body in Oneself As Another, see 319–329). In other words, my body has an active role in structuring my perceptions, and so, the meaning of my perceptions needs to be interpreted in the context of my bodily situation. The non-coincidence of myself and my body constitutes a "fault line" within the structure of subjectivity. The result is that knowledge of myself and the world is not constituted by more or less accurate facts, but rather, is a composite discourse--a discourse which charts the intersection of the objective, intersubjective and subjective aspects of lived experience. On this view, all knowledge, including my knowledge of my own existence, is mediate and so calls for interpretation. This also means that self-understanding can never be grasped by the kind of introspective immediacy celebrated by Descartes. Instead, as human beings we are never quite "at one" with ourselves; we are fallible creatures. Thus, who I am is not an objective fact to be discovered, but rather something that I must achieve or create, and to which I must attest. On Ricoeur's view, the question "Who am I ?" is a question specific to a certain kind of being, namely, being a subject of a temporal, material, linguistic and social unity. The ability to grasp oneself as a concrete subject of such a world requires a complex mode of understanding capable of integrating discourses of quite heterogenous kinds, including, importantly, different orders of time. It is to the temporal dimension of selfhood that Ricoeur has most directly addressed his hermeneutic philosophy and narrative model of understanding.

5. Time and Narrative

Central to Ricoeur's defense of narrative is its capacity to represent the human experience of time. Such a capacity is an essential requisite for a reflective philosophy. Ricoeur sets out his account of "human time" in Time and Narrative, Volume 3. He points out that we experience time in two different ways. We experience time as linear succession, we experience the passing hours and days and the progression of our lives from birth to death. This is cosmological time--time expressed in the metaphor of the "river" of time. The other is phenomenological time; time experienced in terms of the past, present and future. As self-aware embodied beings, we not only experience time as linear succession, but we are also oriented to the succession of time in terms of what has been, what is, and what will be. Ricoeur's concept of "human time" is expressive of a complex experience in which phenomenological time and cosmological time are integrated. For example, we understand the full meaning of "yesterday" or "today" by reference to their order in a succession of dated time. To say "Today is my birthday" is to immediately invoke both orders of time: a chronological date to which is anchored the phenomenological concept of "birthday." Ricoeur describes this anchoring as the "inscription" of phenomenological time on cosmological time (TN3 109).

These two conceptions of time have traditionally been seen in opposition, but Ricoeur argues that they share a relation of mutual presupposition. The order of "past-present-future" within phenomenological time presupposes the succession characteristic of cosmological time. The past is always before the present which is always after the past and before the future. The order of succession is invariable, and this order is not part of the concepts of past, present or future considered merely as existential orientations. On the other hand, within cosmological time, the identification of supposedly anonymous instants of time as "before" or "after" within the succession borrows from the phenomenological orientation to past and future. Ricoeur argues that any philosophical model for understanding human existence must employ a composite temporal framework. The only suitable candidate here is the narrative model. Ricoeur links narrative's temporal complexity to Aristotle's characterization of narrative as "the imitation of an action". Ricoeur's account of the way in which narrative represents the human world of acting (and, in its passive mode, suffering) turns on three stages of interpretation that he calls mimesis1 (prefiguration of the field of action), mimesis2 (configuration of the field of action), and mimesis3 (refiguration of the field of action). Mimesis1 describes the way in which the field of human acting is always already prefigured with certain basic competencies, for example, competency in the conceptual network of the semantics of action (expressed in the ability to raise questions of who, how, why, with whom, against whom, etc.); in the use of symbols (being able to grasp one thing as standing for something else); and competency in the temporal structures governing the syntagmatic order of narration (the "followability" of a narrative). Mimesis2 concerns the imaginative configuration of the elements given in the field of action at the level of mimesis1. Mimesis2 concerns narrative "emplotment." Ricoeur describes this level as "the kingdom of the as if" Narrative emplotment brings the diverse elements of a situation into an imaginative order, in just the same way as does the plot of a story. Emplotment here has a mediating function. It configures events, agents and objects and renders those individual elements meaningful as part of a larger whole in which each takes a place in the network that co