Category Archives: History of Philosophy

Laozi (Lao-tzu, fl. 6th cn. B.C.E.)

laoziLaozi is the name of a legendary Daoist philosopher, the alternate title of the early Chinese text better known in the West as the Daodejing, and the moniker of a deity in the pantheon of organized “religious Daoism” that arose during the later Han dynasty (25-220 CE). Laozi is the pinyin Romanization for the Chinese characters which mean "Old Master." Laozi is also known as Lao Tan ("Old Tan") in early Chinese sources (see Romanization systems for Chinese terms). The Zhuangzi is the first text to use Laozi as a personal name and to identify Laozi and Lao Tan. The earliest materials associated with Laozi are in the Zhuangzi’s Inner Chapters. The Outer Chapters of that work have ten logia in which Laozi is the main figure, four of which contain direct attacks on the Confucian virtues of ren, yi, and li that are reminiscent of passages from the Daodejing and probably date from the period in which that collection was reaching some near final form. The earliest ascription of authorship of the Daodejing to Laozi is in Han Feizi and the Huainanzi, but several themes from the Laozi logia of the Zhuangzi are traceable into the Daodejing and on at least two occasions in that text Laozi counsels following dao (the Way) to possess de (virtue). Laozi became a principal figure in institutionalized religious forms of Daoism. He was often associated with many transformations and incarnations of the dao itself.

Table of Contents

1. Laozi and Lao Tan in Early Sources
2. Laozi and the Daodejing
3. Fundamental Concepts in the Daodejing
4. The First Biography and the Establishment of Laozi as the Founder of Daoism
5. The Laozi Myth
6. Select Bibliography

1. Laozi and Lao Tan in Early Sources

Zhuangzi gives the following, probably fictional, account of Confucius's impression of Laozi:

"Master, you've seen Lao Tan—what estimation would you make of him?" Confucius said, "At last I may say that I have seen a dragon—a dragon that coils to show his body at its best, that sprawls out to display his patterns at their best, riding on the breath of the clouds, feeding on the yin and yang. My mouth feel open and I couldn't close it; my tongue flew up and I couldn't even stammer. How could I possibly make any estimation of Lao Tan!" Zhuangzi, Ch. 14

According to The Book of Rites (Li ji), a master known as Lao Tan was an expert on mourning rituals. On four occasions, Confucius (kongzi, Master Kong) is reported to have responded to questions by appealing to answers given by Lao Tan. The records say that Confucius once assisted him in a burial service.

In the Zhuangzi (late 4th century BCE), Lao Tan is usually a critic of Confucius. This is the first text to use Laozi as a personal name and to identify Laozi and Lao tan. The Zhuangzi contains materials from a teacher known as Zhuang Zhou who lived between 370-300 BCE, according to Sima Qian. Chapters 1-7 of the present 33 are those most often ascribed to Zhuangzi (meaning Master Zhuang). Guo Xiang edited the text in the first half of the 3rd Cent. CE. He had 52 sections handed down to him. He rejected the material he thought was inferior and spurious, keeping 33 chapters which he divided into the "inner chapters" (chs. 1-7), "outer chapters" (chs. 8-22) and "mixed chapters," (chs. 23-33). Aside from chs. 1-7, the remaining 26 had origins other than Zhuang Zhou and they sometimes take different points of view. In the citations below, I have followed the practice of prefacing the chapter with its literary critical designation (that is, inner, outer, mixed). These designations are oversimplified textually and arguable, but at least some acknowledgment of where they are located in this textual system may help one understand that some of the passages come from different time periods and have specific polemical agendas.

Assuming that Lao Tan and Laozi are the same figure and counting the one dialogue in Mixed Ch. 27 attributed to Lao Laizi as Laozi, then there are eighteen (18) passages in which Laozi plays a role in the Zhuangzi. It is on the basis on Inner Chapter 3, The Secret of Caring for Life that we identify Lao Tan and Laozi. The passage begins "When Lao Tan died" but then when his disciple Ch'in Shih is attacked by his fellow students for only making three cries and then leaving the funeral hall, the text calls them "Laozi's disciples." Ch'in Shih's defense is "Your master happened to come because it was his time, and he happened to leave because things follow along. If you are content with the time and willing to follow along, then grief and joy have no way to enter." His association of the dead master with the students who are Laozi's disciples, and the opening of the chapter makes the identification of Lao Tan and Laozi pretty clear. Then, there are dialogues in which Lao Tan and Laozi are used interchangeably (see Outer Ch.14, Turning of Heaven and Mixed Ch. 27, Imputed Words). Other biographically significant material includes a reference to Laozi's being the keeper of the Royal Archives of the house of Zhou in Outer Ch. 13, The Way of Heaven.

Laozi's relationship to Confucius is also a major part of the Zhuangzi's picture of the philosopher. Of the eighteen passages mentioning Laozi, Confucius figures as a dialogical partner or subject in nine (9). While it is clear that Confucius is thought to have a long way to go to become a zhen ren (the Zhuangzi's way of speaking about the true man), Lao Tan seems to feel sorry for Confucius in his reply to "No-Toes" in Inner Chapter 5, The Sign of Virtue Complete. He recommends seeking to release Confucius from the fetters of his tendency to make rules and human discriminations (e.g., right/wrong; beautiful/ugly).

Lao Tan addresses Confucius by his personal name "Ch'iu" in three passages. Since such a liberty is one that only a person with seniority and authority would take, this style invites us to believe that Confucius was a student of Lao Tan's and acknowledged him as an authority. However, continuing the theme that Laozi taught Confucius, who was confused and having no success, we should note that the point of the story that mentions Laozi's occupation as an archivist is that Confucius' writings, offered to Laozi by Confucius himself, are simply not worthy to be put into the library. And on another occasion, Confucius claims that he knows the "six classics" thoroughly and that he has tried to persuade 72 kings to their truth, but they have been unmoved. Laozi's reply is, "Good!" He tells Confucius not to occupy himself with such worn out ways, and to live the dao himself (Outer Ch.14, Turning of Heaven).

Another important set of exchanges occurs between Laozi and Confucius over the latter's principal ideas of benevolence (ren) and righteousness (yi). Laozi tells Confucius to forget this teaching and be natural: "Why these flags of benevolence and righteousness so bravely upraised, as though you were beating a drum and searching for a lost child? Ah, you will bring confusion to the nature of man!" (Outer Ch. 13, The Way of Heaven)

Finally, in Outer Ch.14, Turning of Heaven, Lao Tan makes a direct attack not only on the rules and regulations of Confucius, but also the teachings of the Mohists, and the veneration of the ancient emperors and legendary sages of the past.

2. Laozi and the Daodejing

The Daodejing (hereafter, DDJ) has 81 chapters and over 5,000 Chinese characters, depending on which text is used. Its two major divisions are the dao jing (chs. 1-37) and the de jing (chs. 38-81). Actually, this division probably rests on nothing other than the fact that the principal concept opening Chapter 1 is dao (way) and that of Chapter 38 is de (virtue). Nonetheless, the text has been studied by literary critics for centuries. In spite of the long standing tradition that the text had a single author named Laozi, it is clear that the work is a collection of short aphorisms. Most of these probably circulated orally perhaps even singly or in small collections.

For almost 2,000 years, the Chinese text used by commentators in China and upon which all except the most recent Western language translations were based has been called the Wang Bi, after the commentator who used a complete edition of the DDJ sometime between 226-249 CE. Although Wang Bi was not a Daoist, his commentary became a standard interpretive guide, and generally speaking even today scholars depart from it only when they can make a compelling argument for doing so. Based on recent archaeological finds at Guodian in 1993 and Mawangdui in the 1970s we are certain that there were several simultaneously circulating versions of the Daodejing text.

Mawangdui is the name for a site of tombs discovered near Changsha in Hunan province. The Mawangdui discoveries consist of two incomplete editions of the DDJ on silk scrolls (boshu) now simply called "A" and "B." These versions have two principal differences from the Wang Bi. Some word choice divergencies are present. The order of the chapters is reversed, with 38-81 in the Wang Bi coming before chapters 1-37 in the Mawangdui versions. More precisely, the order of the Mawangdui texts takes the traditional 81 chapters and sets them out like this: 38, 39, 40, 42-66, 80, 81, 67-79, 1-21, 24, 22, 23, 25-37. Robert Henricks has published a translation of these texts with extensive notes and comparisons with the Wang Bi under the title Lao-Tzu, Te-tao Ching. Contemporary scholarship associates the Mawangdui versions with a type of Daoism known as the Way of the Yellow Emperor and the Old Master (Huanglao Dao), since the Yellow Emperor was venerated alongside of Laozi as a patron of the teachings of Daoism. The prevailing view is that the present version of the DDJ probably reached its final form at the Qixia Academy of the Ji kingdom associated with Huanglao Daoism around the beginning of the 3rd century BCE.

The Guodian find consists of 730 inscribed bamboo slips found near the village of Guodian in Hubei province in 1993. There are 71 slips with material that is also found in 31 of the 81 chapters of the DDJ and corresponding to Chapters 1-66. It may date as early as c. 300 BCE. If this is a correct date, then the Daodejing was already extant in a written form when the "inner chapters" (see below) of the Zhuangzi were composed. These slips contain more significant variants from the Wang Bi than the Mawangdui versions.

Thus, there is really no scholarly support for the idea that the text was written by a single author, and certainly not by a person named Laozi. Having said this, it is true that twice in the Outer Chapters there are extensive passages in which Lao Tan makes remarks that are very close parallels to the Daodejing. The most prominent of these is Outer Ch. 33, The World. "Lao Tan said, 'Know the male but cling to the female; become the ravine of the world. Know the pure but cling to the dishonor; become the valley of the world.' He said, 'What is brittle will be broken, what is sharp will be blunted.'"

Perhaps these allusions lie behind the fact that both the Han Feizi and Huainanzi (180-122 BCE) attribute the authorship of the Daodejing to Laozi. Then, in Sima Qian's biography of Laozi, he not only says that Laozi was the author of the Daodejng, but he explains that it was a written text of his teachings given when he departed China to go to the West. So, by the 1st Cent. BCE, this was accepted. Any discussion of Laozi's philosophy, is inseparable from a discussion of the Daodejing.

3. Fundamental Concepts in the Daodejing

The term Dao means a road, and is often translated as "the Way". This is because sometimes dao is used as a nominative (that is, "the dao") and other times as a verb (i.e. daoing). Dao is the process of reality itself, the way things come together, while still transforming. All this reflects the deep seated Chinese belief that change is the most basic character of things. In the Yi jing (Classic of Change) the patterns of this change are symbolized by figures standing for 64 relations of correlative forces and known as the hexagrams. Dao is the alteration of these forces, most often simply stated as yin and yang. The Xici is a commentary on the Yi jing formed in about the same period as the DDJ. It takes the taiji (Great Ultimate) as the source of correlative change and associates it with the dao. The contrast is not between what things are or that something is or is not, but between chaos (hundun) and the way reality is ordering (de). Yet, reality is not ordering into one unified whole. It is the 10,000 things (wanwu). There is the dao but not "the World" or "the cosmos" in a Western sense.

The Daodejing teaches that humans cannot fathom the Dao, because any name we give to it cannot capture it. It is beyond what we can conceive (ch.1). Those who wu wei may become one with it and thus obtain the dao. Wu wei is a difficult notion to translate. Yet, it is generally agreed that the traditional rendering of it as "nonaction" or "no action" is incorrect. Those who wu wei do act. Daoism is not a philosophy of "doing nothing." Wu wei means something like "act naturally," "effortless action," or "nonwillful action." The point is that there is no need for human tampering with the flow of reality. Wu wei should be our way of life, because the dao always benefits, it does not harm (ch. 81) The way of heaven (dao of tian) is always on the side of good (ch. 79) and virtue (de) comes forth from the dao alone (ch. 21). What causes this natural embedding of good and benefit in the dao is vague and elusive (ch. 35), not even the sages understand it (ch. 76). But the world is a reality that is filled with spiritual force, just as a sacred image used in religious ritual might be (ch. 29). The dao occupies the place in reality that is analogous to the part of a family's house set aside for the altar for venerating the ancestors and gods (the ao of the house, ch. 62). When we think that life's occurrences seem unfair (a human discrimination), we should remember that heaven's (tian) net misses nothing, it leaves nothing undone (ch. 37)

A central theme of the Daodejing is that correlatives are the expressions of the movement of dao. Correlatives in Chinese philosophy are not opposites, mutually excluding each other. They represent the ebb and flow of the forces of reality: yin/yang, male/female; excess/defect; leading/following; active/passive. As one approaches the fullness of yin, yang begins to horizon and emerge. Its teachings on correlation often suggest to interpreters that the DDJ is filled with paradoxes. For example, ch. 22 says, "Those who are crooked will be perfected. Those who are bent will be straight. Those who are empty will be full." While these appear paradoxical, they are probably better understood as correlational in meaning. The DDJ says, "straightforward words seem paradoxical," implying, however, that they are not (ch. 78).

What is the image of the ideal person, the sage (sheng ren), the real person (zhen ren) in the DDJ? Well, sages wu wei (chs. 2, 63). In this respect, they are like newborn infants, who move naturally, without planning and reliance on the structures given to them by others (ch. 15). The DDJ tells us that sages empty themselves, becoming void of pretense. Sages concentrate their internal energies (qi). They clean their vision (ch. 10). They manifest plainness and become like uncarved wood (pu) (ch. 19). They live naturally and free from desires given by men (ch. 37) They settle themselves and know how to be content (ch. 46). The DDJ makes use of some very famous analogies to drive home its point. Sages know the value of emptiness as illustrated by how emptiness is used in a bowl, door, window, valley or canyon (ch. 11). They preserve the female (yin), meaning that they know how to be receptive and are not unbalanced favoring assertion and action (yang) (ch. 28). They shoulder yin and embrace yang, blend internal energies (qi) and thereby attain harmony (he) (ch. 42). Those following the dao do not strive, tamper, or seek control (ch. 64). They do not endeavor to help life along (ch. 55), or use their heart-mind (xin) to "solve" or "figure out" life's apparent knots and entanglements (ch. 55). Indeed, the DDJ cautions that those who would try to do something with the world will fail, they will actually ruin it (ch. 29). Sages do not engage in disputes and arguing, or try to prove their point (chs. 22, 81). They are pliable and supple, not rigid and resistive (chs. 76, 78). They are like water (ch. 8), finding their own place, overcoming the hard and strong by suppleness (ch. 36). Sages act with no expectation of reward (chs. 2, 51). They put themselves last and yet come first (ch. 7). They never make a display of themselves, (chs. 72, 22). They do not brag or boast, (chs. 22, 24) and they do not linger after their work is done (ch. 77). They leave no trace (ch. 27). Because they embody dao in practice, they have longevity (ch. 16). They create peace (ch. 32). Creatures do not harm them (chs. 50, 55). Soldiers do not kill them (ch. 50). Heaven (tian) protects the sage and the sage becomes invincible (ch. 67).

Among the most controversial of the teachings in the DDJ are those directly associated with rulers. Recent scholarship is moving toward a consensus that the persons who developed and collected the teachings of the DDJ played some role in civil administration, but they may also have been practitioners of ritual arts and what we would call religious rites. Be that as it may, many of the aphorisms directed toward rulers seem puzzling at first sight. According to the DDJ, the proper ruler keeps the people without knowledge, (ch. 65), fills their bellies, opens their hearts and empties them of desires (ch. 3). A sagely ruler reduces the size of the state and keeps the population small. Even though the ruler possesses weapons, they are not used (ch. 80). The ruler does not seek prominence. The ruler is a shadowy presence (chs. 17, 66). When the ruler's work is done, the people say they are content (ch. 17). This is all the more interesting when we remember that the philosopher and legalist political theorist named Han Feizi used the DDJ as a guide for the unification of China. Han Feizi was the foremost counselor of the first emperor of China, Qin Shihuangdi (r. 221-206 BCE). It is a pity that the emperor used the DDJ's admonitions to "fill the bellies and empty the minds" to justify his program of destroying all books not related to medicine, astronomy or agriculture.

4. The First Biography and the Establishment of Laozi as the Founder of Daoism

We have now arrived at the stage where studies of Lao Tan usually begin. The first known attempt to write a biography of Laozi is in the Shi ji (Records of the Historian, c. 90-104 BCE) by Sima Qian (145-89 BCE). According to this text, Laozi's surname was Li, and his personal name was Er. The narrative does not use the name Lao Tan, only Laozi. However, Qian reports that a historiographer named Tan did advise one of the Dukes of Qin, and that he indeed predicted the Zhou and Qin would split and a new empire would emerge. Then he says, "Some say Tan was Laozi, some say not. No one in our time knows whether or not it is so." (translations from Sima Qian done by A.C. Graham) In yet a further effort to narrow down the identification of Laozi, Qian mentions the Lao Laizi of the Zhuangzi and acknowledges that he came from the same state as Laozi, and that he authored a work of 15 sections on Daoist practice. Qian says Lao Laizi was a contemporary of Confucius, but clearly he seems to make a distinction between Lao Laizi and Laozi. Finally, there is the end of the biography in which Qian talks about Laozi's son's fortunes and ties them to the area from which the Han ruling family came.

Qian's biographical account follows the Zhuangzi in stating Laozi's occupation as an archivist for the state of Zhou. Like the Zhuangzi it also reports exchanges between Laozi and Confucius. Two dialogues are briefly reported. In one, Laozi tells Confucius to give up his stiff deportment and prideful airs. It is very similar to Zhuangzi Mixed Chapter 26. In the other passage, Confucius is reported to have praised Laozi's wisdom and to have compared him to a dragon in a way virtually identical to Zhuangzi Outer Chapter 14.

Sima Qian says, "Laozi cultivated the dao and its virtue." We recognize of course that "dao and its virtue" is Dao de, and that this is a reference to Laozi's association with the Daodejing. What the Zhuangzi only alluded to by putting near quotes from the DDJ in the mouth of Laozi, Sima Qian makes explicit. He tells us that when the Zhou kingdom began to decline, Laozi decided to leave China and head into the West. When he reached the mountain pass, the keeper of the pass (Yin Xi, also called Kuan-yin) insisted that he write down his teachings, so that the people would have them after he left. So, "Laozi wrote a book in two parts, discussing the ideas of the Way and of Virtue in some 5,000 words, and departed. No one knows where he ended his life."

A.C. Graham has made a study of Sima Qian's account and the other origins of the Lao Tan (Laozi) legend. Graham believes that the oldest stratum of the stories about Lao Tan is actually a Confucian tale relating how Confucius sought instruction in the rites from Lao Tan, who was known as an archivist of Zhou. Graham dates this part of the legend as far back as the 4th Cent. BCE. What we do not know is whether this account actually preserves some factual historical reminiscence, or simply an exemplary story designed to show that Confucius sought learning anywhere and was humbly willing to be taught by anyone. But then what happened was that Lao Tan was adopted in the "Inner Chapters" of the Zhuangzi (before 300 BCE) as a spokesmen for Zhuang Zhou's views and an instructor of Confucius.

The next stage in the development of Laozi's biography was the appearance of Laozi under the name Lao Tan, thereby appropriating the place Tan had occupied as a teacher of Confucius. We cannot be certain whether this identification of the two figures was actually done by Zhuang Zhou or was a later redaction of Inner Ch. 3. But certainly Lao Tan and Laozi are used interchangeably in Outer Ch.14, Turning of Heaven and Mixed Ch. 27, Imputed Words. From this point on, Laozi is offered as a figure representing a definite philosophical trend.

Another movement in the evolution of the Laozi story was completed by about 240 BCE. This was necessitated by Lao Tan's association with the grand historiographer Tan during the Zhou, who predicted the rise of the Qin state. This information, along with that of Laozi's journey to the West, and of the writing of the book for Yin Xi (Kuan-yin) won the favor for Laozi from the Qin. And the association of Laozi with a text (the DDJ) that was becoming increasingly significant was important. However, with the demise of the Qin state, some realignment of Laozi's connection with them was needed. So, Qian's final remarks about Laozi's son helped to associate the philosopher's lineage with the new Han ruling family. The journey to the West component now also had a new force. It explained why Laozi was not presently advising the Han rulers.

Sima Qian classified the Six Schools as Yin-Yang, Confucian, Mohist, Legalists, School of Names, and Daoists. Since his biography located Laozi earlier than Zhuangzi, and the passages in the Zhuangzi seemed to be about a person who lived before the text (and not to be simply a literary or traditional invention), then Laozi became established as the founder of the Daoist school.

5. The Laozi Myth

Livia Kohn has written a historical account of the development of the Laozi myth from the Han through the Six Dynasties period (200 BCE to 600 CE). In The Lives of the Immortals by Liu Xiang (Lie xuan zhuan, 77-6 BCE) there are separate entries for Laozi and Yin Xi (Kuan-yin). According to the story, Yin became a disciple and begged Laozi to allow him to go to the West as well. Laozi told him that he could come along, but only after he cultivated the dao. Laozi instructed Yin to study hard and await a summons which would be delivered to him in the marketplace in Chengdu. There is now a shrine at the putative location of this site dedicated to "ideal discipleship." More importantly, in this text it is clear that practitioners of immortality regarded Laozi as a superior daoshi (fangshi) who had achieved immortality through wisdom and the practice of techniques for longevity.

Emperor Huan (r. 147-167 CE) built a palace on the traditional site of Laozi's birthplace and authorized veneration and sacrifice to Laozi. The Laozi ming (Inscription on Laozi) written by Pien Shao in c. 166 CE as a commemorative marker for the site goes well beyond Sima Qian's biography. It makes the first apotheosis of Laozi into a deity. The text makes reference to the many cosmic metamorphoses of Laozi, allowing him portraying him as having been counselor to the great sage kings of China. The elite at the imperial court divinized Laozi and regarded him as an embodiment of the dao, a kind of cosmic emperor who knew how to rule things in perfect harmony and bring peace.

During the reign of Emperor Huidi of the Western Jin dynasty (290-306 CE), Wang Fu, a libationer of the Celestial Masters Tradition often debated with the Buddhist monk Bo Yuan about philosophical beliefs. The result was that Fu wrote a one volume work entitled Book of Laozi's Conversion of the Barbarians (laozi huahu jing) designed to put forward the view that Laozi went to India, changed into Buddha, and converted the barbarians. The basic thrust of the book was that Buddhism was a form of Daoism. Later, the work was gradually enlarged and adapted into ten volumes and it became a repository for Daoist polemic against Buddhism. Both Emperor Gaozong and Emperor Zhongzong of the Tang dynasty gave orders to prohibit its distribution. In the Yuan dynasty (1285 CE), Emperor Shizu ordered the burning of the Daoist canon of texts, and the first one destroyed was the Book of the Conversion of Barbarians.

The Daoist cosmological belief in the transformation of beings was greatly strengthened by the text Scripture on the Transformations of Laozi (The Laozi Bianhua Wuji Jing, late 100s CE). This work reflects some of the ideas in Pien Shao's inscription, but takes them much further. It tells how Laozi transformed into his own mother and gave birth to himself, taking quite literally comments in the DDJ where the dao is portrayed as the mother of all things. The work associates Laozi with the manifestations or incarnations of the dao itself. The final passage is an address given by Laozi predicting his reappearance and promising liberation from trouble and the overthrow of the Han dynasty! The millennial cults of the second century believed Laozi was a messianic figure who appeared to their leaders and gave them instructions and revelations.

The period of the Celestial Masters (c. 142-260 CE) produced documents enhancing the myth of Laozi. Laozi was now called Lao jun (Lord Lao) or Tai Shang Lao Jun (Lord Lao Most High). Lao jun could manifest himself in any time of unrest and bring great peace (tai ping). Yet, the Celestial Masters never claimed that Lao jun had done so in their day. Instead of such a direct manifestation, the Celestial Masters practitioners taught that Lao jun transmitted to them talismans, registers, and new scriptures in the form of texts.

Most later writings about Laozi continued to base their appeals to Laozi's authority on his ongoing transmigrations, but they give evidence of the growing tension between Daoism and Buddhism. The first mythological account of Laozi's birth is in the Scripture of the Inner Explanation of the Three Heavens, a Celestial Master work dated about 420 CE. In this text, Laozi has three births: as the manifestation of the dao from pure energy to become a deity in heaven; in human form as the ancient philosopher of the Daodejing; and as the Buddha after his journey to the West. In the first birth, his mother is known as The Jade Maiden of Mystery and Wonder. In his second, he is born to a human woman known as Mother Li. This was an eighty-one year pregnancy, after which he was born from her left armpit (there is a tradition that Buddha had been born from his mother's right arm pit). At birth he had white hair and so he was called laozi (Old Child). This birth is set in the time of the Shang dynasty, several centuries before the date Sima Qian reports. But the purpose of such a move is to allow him time to travel to the West and then become the Buddha. The third birth takes place in India as the Buddha. For details of this birth we turn to Esoteric Record of Mystery and Wonder, another fifth century document of the Celestial Masters. According to this text, Laozi entered into the body of the wife of the king of India through her mouth. Later he was born through her left arm pit. He walked immediately after his birth, and "from then on Buddhist teaching came to flourish." (quoted in Kohn)

Ge Hong's (283-343 CE) The Inner Chapters of the Master Who Embraces Simplicity (Baopuzi neipian) is the most important Daoist philosophical work of that period. Ge Hong said that in a state of visualization he saw Laozi, seven feet tall, with cloudlike garments of five colors, wearing a multi-tiered cap and carrying a sharp sword. According to Ge, Laozi had a prominent nose, long eyebrows, and an elongated head. This physiological type was template for portraying immortals in Daoist art.

Authority for Celestial Masters practices and beliefs was usually backed up by some new account of Laozi. In the 500s CE the Scripture on Opening the Cosmos had Laozi teach the sage-king who developed agriculture about the grains, so that the people would not have to kill birds and beasts for food. And he taught another sage-king how to make fire.

The hagiography of Laozi has continued to develop, down to the present day. There are even traditions that various natural geographic landmarks and features are the enduring imprint of Lord Lao on China and his face can be seen in them. It is more likely, of course, that Laozi's immortality is in the mark made by the philosophical movement he has come to represent and the culture it created..

6. Select Bibliography

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Bokenkamp, Stephen R. (1997). Early Daoist Scriptures. Berkeley: University of California Press.

Csikszentmihalyi, Mark and Ivanhoe, Philip J., eds. (1999). Religious and Philosophical Aspects of the Laozi. Albany: State University of New York.

Giles, Lionel. (1948). A Gallery of Chinese Immortals. London: John Murray.

Graham, Angus. (1981). Chuang tzu: The Inner Chapters. London: Allen & Unwin.

Graham, Angus. (1989). Disputers of the Tao: Philosophical Argument in Ancient China. La Salle, IL: Open Court.

Graham, Angus. [1998 (1986)], "The Origins of the Legend of Lao Tan." In Lao-tzu and the Tao-te-ching, ed. Kohn, Livia Kohn and Michael LaFargue, 23-41. Albany: State University of New York Press.

Hansen, Chad. (1992). A Daoist Theory of Chinese Thought. New York: Oxford University Press.

Henricks, Robert. (1989). Lao-Tzu: Te-Tao Ching. New York: Ballantine.

Ivanhoe, Philip J. (2002). The Daodejing of Laozi. New York: Seven Bridges Press.

Kohn, Livia, (1998). "The Lao-Tzu Myth." In Lao-tzu and the Tao-te-ching, ed. Kohn, Livia Kohn and Michael LaFargue, 41-63. Albany: State University of New York Press.

Kohn, Livia, (1996). "Laozi: Ancient Philosopher, Master of Longevity, and Taoist God." In Religions of China in Practice, ed. Donald S. Lopez, 52-63. Princeton: Princeton University Press.

Kohn, Livia and LaFargue, Michael. (1998). Lao-tzu and the Tao-te-ching. Albany: State University of New York Press.

Kohn, Livia and Roth, Harold (2002) Daoist Identity: History, Lineage, and Ritual. Honolulu: University of Hawaii Press.

Watson, Burton. (1968). The Complete Works of Chuang Tzu. New York: Columbia University Press.

Welch, Holmes. (1966). Taoism: The Parting of the Way. Boston: Beacon Press.

Welch, Holmes and Seidel, Anna, eds. (1979). Facets of Taoism. New Haven: Yale University Press.

Author Information

Ronnie Littlejohn
Belmont University
U. S. A.

Augustine (354—430 C.E.)

augustineSt. Augustine is a fourth century philosopher whose groundbreaking philosophy infused Christian doctrine with Neoplatonism.   He is famous for being an inimitable Catholic theologian and for his agnostic contributions to Western philosophy. He argues that skeptics have no basis for claiming to know that there is no knowledge.  In a proof for existence similar to one later made famous by René Descartes, Augustine says, “[Even] If I am mistaken, I am.” He is the first Western philosopher to promote what has come to be called "the argument by analogy" against solipsism: there are bodies external to mine that behave as I behave and that appear to be nourished as mine is nourished; so, by analogy, I am justified in believing that these bodies have a similar mental life to mine. Augustine believes reason to be a uniquely human cognitive capacity that comprehends deductive truths and logical necessity. Additionally, Augustine adopts a subjective view of time and says that time is nothing in reality but exists only in the human mind’s apprehension of reality. He believes that time is not infinite because God “created” it.

Augustine tries to reconcile his beliefs about freewill, especially the belief that humans are morally responsible for their actions, with his belief that one’s life is predestined. Though initially optimistic about the ability of humans to behave morally, at the end he is pessimistic, and thinks that original sin makes human moral behavior nearly impossible: if it were not for the rare appearance of an accidental and undeserved Grace of God, humans could not be moral. Augustine’s theological discussion of freewill is relevant to a non-religious discussion regardless of the religious-specific language he uses; one can switch Augustine’s “omnipotent being” and “original sin” explanation of predestination for the present day “biology” explanation of predestination; the latter tendency is apparent in modern slogans such as “biology is destiny.”

Table of Contents

  1. Early Years
  2. Manichean and Neoplatonist Period
  3. Conversion and Ordination
  4. Later Years
  5. Anti-Manicheanism and Pelagian Writings
  6. Activity Against Donatism
  7. Development of His Views
  8. Miscellaneous Works

1. Early Years

Augustine is the first ecclesiastical author the whole course of whose development can be clearly traced, as well as the first in whose case we are able to determine the exact period covered by his career, to the very day. He informs us himself that he was born at Thagaste (Tagaste; now Suk Arras), in proconsular Numidia, Nov. 13, 354; he died at Hippo Regius (just south of the modern Bona) Aug. 28, 430. [Both Suk Arras and Bona are in the present Algeria, the first 60 m. W. by s. and the second 65 m. w. of Tunis, the ancient Carthage.] His father Patricius, as a member of the council, belonged to the influential classes of the place; he was, however, in straitened circumstances, and seems to have had nothing remarkable either in mental equipment or in character, but to have been a lively, sensual, hot-tempered person, entirely taken up with his worldly concerns, and unfriendly to Christianity until the close of his life; he became a catechumen shortly before Augustine reached his sixteenth year (369-370). To his mother Monnica (so the manuscripts write her name, not Monica; b. 331, d. 387) Augustine later believed that he owed what lie became. But though she was evidently an honorable, loving, self-sacrificing, and able woman, she was not always the ideal of a Christian mother that tradition has made her appear. Her religion in earlier life has traces of formality and worldliness about it; her ambition for her son seems at first to have had little moral earnestness and she regretted his Manicheanism more than she did his early sensuality. It seems to have been through Ambrose and Augustine that she attained the mature personal piety with which she left the world. Of Augustine as a boy his parents were intensely proud. He received his first education at Thagaste, learning, to read and write, as well as the rudiments of Greek and Latin literature, from teachers who followed the old traditional pagan methods. He seems to have had no systematic instruction in the Christian faith at this period, and though enrolled among the catechumens, apparently was near baptism only when an illness and his own boyish desire made it temporarily probable.

His father, delighted with his son's progress in his studies, sent him first to the neighboring Madaura, and then to Carthage, some two days' journey away. A year's enforced idleness, while the means for this more expensive schooling were being accumulated, proved a time of moral deterioration; but we must be on our guard against forming our conception of Augustine's vicious living from the Confessiones alone. To speak, as Mommsen does, of " frantic dissipation " is to attach too much weight to his own penitent expressions of self-reproach. Looking back as a bishop, he naturally regarded his whole life up to the " conversion " which led to his baptism as a period of wandering from the right way; but not long after this conversion, he judged differently, and found, from one point of view, the turning point of his career in his taking up philosophy -in his nineteenth year. This view of his early life, which may be traced also in the Confessiones, is probably nearer the truth than the popular conception of a youth sunk in all kinds of immorality. When he began the study of rhetoric at Carthage, it is true that (in company with comrades whose ideas of pleasure were probably much more gross than his) he drank of the cup of sensual pleasure. But his ambition prevented him from allowing his dissipations to interfere with his studies. His son Adeodatus was born in the summer of 372, and it was probably the mother of this child whose charms enthralled him soon after his arrival at Carthage about the end of 370. But he remained faithful to her until about 385, and the grief which he felt at parting from her shows what the relation had been. In the view of the civilization of that period, such a monogamous union was distinguished from a formal marriage only by certain legal restrictions, in addition to the informality of its beginning and the possibility of a voluntary dissolution. Even the Church was slow to condemn such unions absolutely, and Monnica seems to have received the child and his mother publicly at Thagaste. In any case Augustine was known to Carthage not as a roysterer but as a quiet honorable student. He was, however, internally dissatisfied with his life. The Hortensius of Cicero, now lost with the exception of a few fragments, made a deep impression on him. To know the truth was henceforth his deepest wish. About the time when the contrast between his ideals and his actual life became intolerable, he learned to conceive of Christianity as the one religion which could lead him to the attainment of his ideal. But his pride of intellect held him back from embracing it earnestly; the Scriptures could not bear comparison with Cicero; he sought for wisdom, not for humble submission to authority.

2. Manichean and Neoplatonist Period

In this frame of mind he was ready to be affected by the so-called "Manichean propaganda" which was then actively carried on in Africa, without apparently being much hindered by the imperial edict against assemblies of the sect. Two things especially attracted him to the Manicheans: they felt at liberty to criticize the Scriptures, particularly the Old Testament, with perfect freedom; and they held chastity and self-denial in honor. The former fitted in with the impression which the Bible had made on Augustine himself; the latter corresponded closely to his mood at the time. The prayer which he tells us he had in his heart then, " Lord, give me chastity and temperance, but not now," may be taken as the formula which represents the attitude of many of the Manichean auditores. Among these Augustine was classed during his nineteenth year; but he went no further, though he held firmly to Manicheanism for nine years, during which he endeavored to convert all his friends, scorned the sacraments of the Church, and held frequent disputations with catholic believers.

Having finished his studies, he returned to Thagaste and began to teach grammar, living in the house of Romanianus, a prominent citizen who had been of much service to him since his father's death, and whom he converted to Manicheanism. Monnica deeply grieved at her son's heresy, forbade him her house, until reassured by a vision that promised his restoration. She comforted herself also by the word of a certain bishop (probably of Thagaste) that "the child of so many tears could not be lost." He seems to have spent little more than a year in Thagaste, when the desire for a wider field, together with the death of a dear friend, moved him to return to Carthage as a teacher of rhetoric.

The next period was a time of diligent study, and produced (about the end of 380) the treatise, long since lost, De pulchro et apto. Meanwhile the hold of Manicheanism on him was loosening. Its feeble cosmology and metaphysics had long since failed to satisfy him, and the astrological superstitions springing from the credulity of its disciples offended his reason. The members of the sect, unwilling to lose him, had great hopes from a meeting with their leader Faustus of Mileve; but when he came to Carthage in the autumn of 382, he too proved disappointing, and Augustine ceased to be at heart a Manichean. He was not yet, however, prepared to put anything in the place of the doctrine he had held, and remained in outward communion with his former associates while he pursued his search for truth. Soon after his Manichean convictions had broken down, he left Carthage for Rome, partly, it would seem, to escape the preponderating influence of his mother on a mind which craved perfect freedom of investigation. Here he was brought more than ever, by obligations of friendship and gratitude, into close association with Manicheans, of whom there were many in Rome, not merely auditores but perfecti or fully initiated members. This did not last long, however, for the prefect Symmachus sent him to Milan, certainly before the beginning of 385, in answer to a request for a professor of rhetoric.

The change of residence completed Augustine's separation from Manicheanism. He listened to the preaching of Ambrose and by it was made acquainted with the allegorical interpretation of the Scriptures and the weakness of the Manichean Biblical criticism, but he was not yet ready to accept catholic Christianity. His mind was still under the influence of the skeptical philosophy of the later Academy. This was the least satisfactory stage in his mental development, though his external circumstances were increasingly favorable. He had his mother again with him now, and shared a house and garden with her and his devoted friends Alypius and Nebridius, who had followed him to Milan; his assured social position is shown also by the fact that, in deference to his mother's entreaties, he was formally betrothed to a woman of suitable station. As a catechumen of the Church, he listened regularly to the sermons of Ambrose. The bishop, though as yet he knew nothing of Augustine's internal struggles, had welcomed him in the friendliest manner both for his own and for Monnica's sake. Yet Augustine was attracted only by Ambrose's eloquence, not by his faith; now he agreed, and now he questioned. Morally his life was perhaps at its lowest point. On his betrothal, he had put away the mother of his son; but neither the grief which he felt at this parting nor regard for his future wife, who was as yet too young for marriage, prevented him from taking a new concubine for the two intervening years. Sensuality, however, began to pall upon him, little as he cared to struggle against it. His idealism was by no means dead; he told Romanian, who came to Milan at this time on business, that he wished he could live altogether in accordance with the dictates of philosophy; and a plan was even made for the foundation of a community retired from the world, which should live entirely for the pursuit of truth. With this project his intention of marriage and his ambition interfered, and Augustine was further off than ever from peace of mind.

In his thirty-first year he was strongly attracted to Neoplatonism by the logic of his development. The idealistic character of this philosophy awoke unbounded enthusiasm, and he was attracted to it also by its exposition of pure intellectual being and of the origin of evil. These doctrines brought him closer to the Church, though he did not yet grasp the full significance of its central doctrine of the personality of Jesus Christ. In his earlier writings he names this acquaintance with the Neoplatonic teaching and its relation to Christianity as the turning-point of his life. The truth, as it may be established by a careful comparison of his earlier and later writings, is that his idealism had been distinctly strengthened by Neoplatonism, which had at the same time revealed his own will, and not a natura altera in him, as the subject of his baser desires. This made the conflict between ideal and actual in his life more unbearable than ever. Yet his sensual desires were still so strong that it seemed impossible for him to break away from them.

3. Conversion and Ordination

Help came in a curious way. A countryman of his, Pontitianus, visited him and told him things which he had never heard about the monastic life and the wonderful conquests over self which had been won under its inspiration. Augustine's pride was touched; that the unlearned should take the kingdom of heaven by violence, while he with all his learning was still held captive by the flesh, seemed unworthy of him. When Pontitianus had gone, with a few vehement words to Alypius, he went hastily with him into the garden to fight out this new problem. Then followed the scene so often described. Overcome by his conflicting emotions he left Alypius and threw himself down under a fig-tree in tears. From a neighboring house came a child's voice repeating again and again the simple words Tolle, lege, " Take up and read." It seemed to him a heavenly indication; he picked up the copy of St. Paul's epistles which he had left where he and Alypius had been sitting, and opened at Romans xiii. When he came to the words, " Let us walk honestly as in the day; not in rioting and drunkenness, not in chambering and wantonness," it seemed to him that a decisive message had been sent to his own soul, and his resolve was taken. Alypius found a word for himself a few lines further, " Him that is weak in the faith receive ye;" and together they went into the house to bring the good news to Monnica. This was at the end of the summer of 386.

Augustine, intent on breaking wholly with his old life, gave up his position, and wrote to Ambrose to ask for baptism. The months which intervened between that summer and the Easter of the following year, at which, according to the early custom, he intended to receive the sacrament, were spent in delightful calm at a country-house, put at his disposal by one of his friends, at Cassisiacum (Casciago, 47 m. n. by w. of Alilan). Here Monnica, Alypius, Adeodatus, and some of his pupils kept him company, and he still lectured on Vergil to them and held philosophic discussions. The whole party returned to Milan before Easter (387), and Augustine, with Alypius and Adeodatus, was baptized. Plans were then made for returning to Africa; but these were upset by the death of Monnica, which took place at Ostia as they were preparing to cross the sea, and has been described by her devoted son in one of the most tender and beautiful passages of the Confessiones. Augustine remained at least another year in Italy, apparently in Rome, living the same quiet life which he had led at Cassisiacum, studying and writing, in company with his countryman Evodius, later bishop of Uzalis. Here, where he had been most closely associated with the Manicheans, his literary warfare with them naturally began; and he was also writing on free will, though this book was only finished at Hippo in 391. In the autumn of 388, passing through Carthage, he returned to Thagaste, a far different man from the Augustine who had left it five years before. Alypius was still with him, and also Adeodatus, who died young, we do not know when or where. Here Augustine and his friends again took up a quiet, though not yet in any sense a monastic, life in common, and pursued their favorite studies. About the beginning of 391, having found a friend in Hippo to help in the foundation of what he calls a monastery, he sold his inheritance, and was ordained presbyter in response to a general demand, though not without misgivings on his own part.

The years which he spent in the presbyterate (391-395) are the last of his formative period. The very earliest works which fall within the time of his episcopate show us the fully developed theologian of whose special teaching we think when we speak of Augustinianism. There is little externally noteworthy in these four years. He took up active work not later than the Easter of 391, when we find him preaching to the candidates for baptism. The plans for a monastic community which had brought him to Hippo were now realized. In a garden given for the purpose by the bishop, Valerius, he founded his monastery, which seems to have been the first in Africa, and is of especial significance because it maintained a clerical school and thus made a connecting link between monastics and the secular clergy. Other details of this period are that he appealed to Aurelius, bishop of Carthage, to suppress the custom of holding banquets and entertainments in the churches, and by 395 had succeeded, through his courageous eloquence, in abolishing it in Hippo; that in 392 a public disputation took place between him and a Manichean presbyter of Hippo, Fortunatus; that his treatise De fide et symbols was prepared to be read before the council held at Hippo October 8, 393; and that after that he was in Carthage for a while, perhaps in connection with the synod held there in 394.

4. Later Years

The intellectual interests of these four years are more easily determined, principally concerned as they are with the Manichean controversy, and producing the treatises De utilitate credendi (391), De duabus animabus contra Manichaos (first half of 392), and Contra Adimantum (394 or 395). His activity against the Donatists also begins in this period, but he is still more occupied with the Manicheans, both from the recollections of his own past and from his increasing knowledge of Scripture, which appears, together with a stronger hold on the Church's teaching, in the works just named, and even more in others of this period, such as his expositions of the Sermon on the Mount and of the Epistles to the Romans and the Galatians. Full as the writings of this epoch are, however, of Biblical phrases and terms,-grace and the law, predestination, vocation, justification, regeneration-a reader who is thoroughly acquainted with Neoplatonism will detect Augustine's avid love of it in a Christian dress in not a few places. He has entered so far into St. Paul's teaching that humanity as a whole appears to him a massa peccati or peccatorum, which, if left to itself, that is, without the grace of God, must inevitably perish. However much we are here reminded of the later Augustine, it is clear that he still held the belief that the free will of man could decide his own destiny. He knew some who saw in Romans ix an unconditional predestination which took away the freedom of the will; but he was still convinced that this was not the Church's teaching. His opinion on this point did not change till after he was a bishop.

The more widely known Augustine became, the more Valerius, the bishop of Hippo, was afraid of losing him on the first vacancy of some neighboring see, and desired to fix him permanently in Hippo by making him coadjutor-bishop,-a desire in which the people ardently concurred. Augustine was strongly opposed to the project, though possibly neither he nor Valerius knew that it might be held to be a violation of the eighth canon of Niema, which forbade in its last clause " two bishops in one city "; and the primate of Numidia, Megalius of Calama, seems to have raised difficulties which sprang at least partly from a personal lack of confidence. But Valerius carried his plan through, and not long before Christmas, 395, Augustine was consecrated by Megalius. It is not known when Valerius died; but it makes little difference, since for the rest of his life he left the administration more and more in the hands of his assistant. Space forbids any attempt to trace events of his later life; and in what remains to be said, biographical interest must be largely our guide. We know a considerable number of events in Augustine's episcopal life which can be surely placed-the so-called third and eighth synods of Carthage in 397 and 403, at which, as at those still to be mentioned, he was certainly present; the disputation with the Manichean Felix at Hippo in 404; the eleventh synod of Carthage in 407; the conference with the Donatists in Carthage, 411; the synod of Mileve, 416; the African general council at Carthage, 418; the journey to Caesarea in Mauretania and the disputation with the Donatist bishop there, 418; another general council in Carthage, 419; and finally the consecration of Eraclius as his assistant in 426.

5. Anti-Manicheanism and Pelagian Writings

His special and direct opposition to Manicheanism did not last a great while after his consecration. About 397 he wrote a tractate Contra epistolam [Manichcet] quam vocant fundamenti; in the De agone christiano, written about the same time, and in the Confessiones, a little later, numerous anti-Manichean expressions occur. After this, however, he only attacked the Manicheans on some special occasion, as when, about 400, on the request of his "brethren," he wrote a detailed rejoinder to Faustus, a Manichean bishop, or made the treatise De natura boni out of his discussions with Felix; a little later, also, the letter of the Manichean Secundinus gave him occasion to write Contra Secundinum, which, in spite of its comparative brevity, he regarded as the best of his writings on this subject. In the succeeding period, he was much more occupied with anti-Donatist polemics, which in their turn were forced to take second place by the emergence of the Pelagian controversy.

It has been thought that Augustine's anti-Pelagian teaching grew out of his conception of the Church and its sacraments as a means of salvation; and attention was called to the fact that before the Pelagian controversy this aspect of the Church had, through the struggle with the Donatists, assumed special importance in his mind. But this conception should be denied. It is quite true that in 395 Augustine's views on sin and grace, freedom and predestination, were not what they afterward came to be. But the new trend was given to them before the time of his anti-Donatist activity, and so before he could have heard anything of Pelagius. What we call Augustinianism was not a reaction against Pelagianism; it would be much truer to say that the latter was a reaction against Augustine's views. He himself names the beginning of his episcopate as the turning-point. Accordingly, in the first thing which he wrote after his consecration, the De diversis gucestionibus ad Simplicianum (396 or 397), we come already upon the new conception. In no other of his writings do we see as plainly the gradual attainment of conviction on any point; as he himself says in the Retractationes, he was laboring for the free choice of the will of man, but the grace of God won the day. So completely was it won, that we might set forth the specifically Augustinian teaching on grace, as against the Pelagians and the Massilians, by a series of quotations taken wholly from this treatise. It is true that much of his later teaching is still undeveloped here; the question of predestination (though the word is used) does not really come up; he is not clear as to the term " election"; and nothing is said of the " gift of perseverance." But what we get on these points later is nothing but the logical consequence of that which is expressed here, and so we have the actual genesis of Augustine's predestinarian teaching under our eyes. It is determined by no reference to the question of infant baptism -- still less by any considerations connected with the conception of the Church. The impulse comes directly from Scripture, with the help, it is true, of those exegetical thoughts which he mentioned earlier as those of others and not his own. To be sure, Paul alone can not explain this doctrine of grace; this is evident from the fact that the very definition of grace is non-Pauline. Grace is for Augustine, both now and later, not the misericordia peccata condonans of the Reformers, as justification is not the alteration of the relation to God accomplished by means of the accipere remissionem. Grace is rather the misericordia which displays itself in the divine inspiratio and justification is justum or pium fieri as a result of this. We may even say that this grace is an interne illuminatio such as a study of Augustine's Neoplatonism enables us easily to understand, which restores the connection with the divine bonum esse. He had long been convinced that " not only the greatest but also the smallest good things can not be, except from him from whom are all good things, that is, from God;" and it might well seem to him to follow from this that faith, which is certainly a good thing, could proceed from the operation of God alone. This explains the idea that grace works like a law of nature, drawing the human will to God with a divine omnipotence. Of course this Neoplatonic coloring must not be exaggerated; it is more consistent with itself in his earlier writings than in the later, and he would never have arrived at his predestinarian teaching without the New Testament. With this knowledge, we are in a position to estimate the force of a difficulty which now confronted Augustine for the first time, but never afterward left him, and which has been present in the Roman Catholic teaching even down to the Councils of Trent and the Vatican. If faith depends upon an action of our own, solicited but not caused by vocation, it can only save a man when, per fidem gratiam accipiens, he becomes one who not merely believes in God but loves him also. But if faith has been already inspired by grace, and if, while the Scripture speaks of justification by faith, it is held (in accordance with the definition of grace) that justification follows upon the infitsio caritatis, -then either the conception of the faith which is God-inspired must pass its fluctuating boundaries and, approach nearer to that of caritas, or the conception of faith which is unconnected with caritas will render the fact of its inspiration unintelligible and justification by faith impossible. Augustine's anti-Pelagian writings set forth this doctrine of grace more clearly in some points, such as the terms " election," " predestination," " the gift of perseverance," and also more logically; but space forbids us to show this here, as the part taken in this controversy by Augustine is so fully detailed elsewhere.

6. Activity Against Donatism

In order to arrive at a decision as to what influence the Donatist controversy had upon Augustine's intellectual development, it is necessary to see how long and how intensely he was concerned with it. We have seen that even before he was a bishop he was defending the catholic Church against the Donatists; and after his consecration he took part directly or indirectly in all the important discussions of the matter, some of which have been already mentioned, and defended the cause of the Church in letters and sermons as well as in his more formal polemical writings. The first of these which belongs to the period of his episcopate, Contra partem Donati, has been lost; about 400 he wrote the two cognate treatises Contra epistulam Parmeniani (the Donatist bishop of Carthage) and De baptismo contra Donatistas. He was considered by the schismatics as their chief antagonist, and was obliged to defend himself against a libelous attack on their part in a rejoinder now lost. From the years 401 and 402 we have the reply to the Donatist bishop of Cirta, Contra epistulam Petiliani, and also the Epistula ad catholicos de unitate ecclesioe. The conflict was now reaching its most acute stage. After the Carthaginian synod of 403 had made preparations for a decisive debate with the Donatists, and the latter had declined to fall in with the plan, the bitterness on both sides increased. Another synod at Carthage the following year decided that the emperor should be asked for penal laws against the Donatists. Honorius granted the request; but the employment of force in matters of belief brought up a new point of discord between the two sides. When these laws were abrogated (409), the plan of a joint conference was tried once more in June, 411, under imperial authority, nearly 300 bishops being present from each side, with Augustine and Aurelius of Carthage as the chief representatives of the Catholic cause. In the following year, the Donatists proving insubordinate, Honorius issued a new and severer edict against them, which proved the beginning of the end for the schism. For these years from 405 to 412 we have twenty-one extant letters of Augustine's bearing on the controversy, and there were eight formal treatises, but four of these are lost. Those which we still have are: Contra Cresconium grammaticum (about 406); De unico baptismio (about 410 or 411), in answer to a work of the same name by Petilian; the brief report of the conference (end of 411); and the Liber contra Donatistas post collationem (probably 412).

7. Development of His Views

The earliest of the extant works against the Donatists present the same views of the Church and its sacraments which Augustine developed later. The principles which he represented in this conflict are merely those which, in a simpler form, had either appeared in the anti-Donatist polemics before his time or had been part of his own earlier belief. What he did was to formulate them with more dogmatic precision,. and to permeate the ordinary controversial theses with his own deep thoughts on unitas, caritas, and inspiratio gratice in the Church, thoughts which again trace their origin back to his Neoplatonic foundations. In the course of the conflict he changed his opinion about the methods to be employed; he had at first been opposed to the employment of force, but later came to the " Compel them to come in " point of view. It may well be doubted, however, if the practical struggle with the schismatics had as much to do with Augustine's development as has been supposed. Far more weight must be attached to the fact that Augustine had become a presbyter and a bishop of the catholic Church, and as such worked continually deeper into the ecclesiastical habit of thought. This was not hard for the son of Monnica and the reverent admirer of Ambrose. His position as a bishop may fairly be said to be the only determining factor in his later views besides his Neoplatonist foundation, his earnest study of the Scripture, and the predestinarian conception of grace which he got from this. Everything else is merely secondary. Thus we find Augustine practically complete by the beginning of his episcopate-about the time when he wrote the Confessiones. It would be too much to say that his development stood still after that; the Biblical and ecclesiastical coloring of his thoughts becomes more and more visible and even vivid; but such development as this is no more significant than the effect of the years seen upon a strong face; in fact, it is even less observable here-for while the characteristic features of his spiritual mind stand out more sharply as time goes on with Augustine, his mental force shows scarcely a sign of age at seventy. His health was uncertain after 386, and his body aged before the time; on Sept. 26, 426, he solemnly designated Eraclius (or Heraclius) as his successor, though without consecrating him bishop, and transferred to him such a portion of his duties as was possible. But his intellectual vigor remained unabated to the end. We see him, as Prosper depicts him in his chronicle, " answering the books of Julian in the very end of his days, while the on-rushing Vandals were at the gates, and gloriously persevering in the defense of Christian grace." In the third month of the siege of Hippo by the barbarian invaders, he fell ill of a fever and, after lingering more than ten days, died Aug. 28, 430. He was able to read on his sick-bed; he had the Penitential Psalms placed upon the wall of his room where he could see them. Meditating upon them, he fulfilled what he had often said before, that even Christians revered for the sanctity of their lives, even presbyters, ought not to leave the world without fitting thoughts of penitence.

8. Miscellaneous Works

Of works not yet mentioned, those written after 395 and named in the Retractationes, may be classified under three heads-exegetical works; minor dogmatic, polemical, and practical treatises; and a separate class containing four more extensive works of special importance. The earliest of the minor treatises is De catechizandis rudibus (about 400), interesting for its connection with the history of catechetical instruction and for many other reasons. A brief enumeration of the others will suffice; they are: De opera monachorum (about 400); De bono conjugali and De sancta virginitate (about 401), both directed against Jovinian's depreciation of virginity; De deviation damonum (between 406 and 411); De fide et operibus (413), a completion of the argument in the De spiritu et litera, useful for a study of the difference between the Augustinian and the Lutheran doctrines of grace; De cura pro mortuis, interesting as showing his attitude toward superstition within the Church; and a few others of less interest. We come now to the four works which have deserved placing in a special category. One is the De doctrina christiana (begun about 397, finished 426), important as giving his theory of scriptural interpretation and homiletics; another is the Enchiridion de fide, spe, et caritate (about 421), noteworthy as an attempt at a systematic collocation of his thoughts. There remain the two doctrinal masterpieces, the De trinitate (probably begun about 400 and finished about 416) and the De civitate Dei (begun about 413, finished about 426). The last-named, beginning with an apologetic purpose, takes on later the form of a history of the City of God from its beginnings.

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Hindu Philosophy

hindu2The compound “Hindu philosophy” is ambiguous. Minimally it stands for a tradition of Indian philosophical thinking. However, it could be interpreted as designating one comprehensive philosophical doctrine, shared by all Hindu thinkers. The term “Hindu philosophy” is often used loosely in this philosophical or doctrinal sense, but this usage is misleading. There is no single, comprehensive philosophical doctrine shared by all Hindus that distinguishes their view from contrary philosophical views associated with other Indian religious movements such as Buddhism or Jainism on issues of epistemology, metaphysics, logic, ethics or cosmology. Hence, historians of Indian philosophy typically understand the term “Hindu philosophy” as standing for the collection of philosophical views that share a textual connection to certain core Hindu religious texts (the Vedas), and they do not identify “Hindu philosophy” with a particular comprehensive philosophical doctrine.

Hindu philosophy, thus understood, not only includes the philosophical doctrines present in Hindu texts of primary and secondary religious importance, but also the systematic philosophies of the Hindu schools: Nyāya, Vaiśeṣika, Sāṅkhya, Yoga, Pūrvamīmāṃsā and Vedānta. In total, Hindu philosophy has made a sizable contribution to the history of Indian philosophy and its role has been far from static: Hindu philosophy was influenced by Buddhist and Jain philosophies, and in turn Hindu philosophy influenced Buddhist philosophy in India in its later stages. In recent times, Hindu philosophy evolved into what some scholars call "Neo-Hinduism," which can be understood as an Indian response to the perceived sectarianism and scientism of the West. Hindu philosophy thus has a long history, stretching back from the second millennia B.C.E. to the present.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
    1. Defining Hinduism: Salient Features and False Starts
      1. Karma
      2. Polytheism
      3. Purushārthas: dharma, artha, kāma and mokṣa
      4. Varna (Caste)
    2. A Textual Definition of Hinduism and Hindu Philosophy
  2. Stage One: Non-Systematic Hindu Philosophy: The Religious Texts
    1. The Four Vedas
      1. Karma Khaṇḍa or Action Section of the Vedas
      2. Jñana Khaṇḍa or Knowledge Section of the Vedas
    2. Secondary Texts: Smṛti Literature
      1. Itihāsas
      2. Bhagavad Gītā
      3. Purāṇas
      4. Dharmaśāstra
  3. Stage Two: Systematic Hindu Philosophy: the Darśanas
    1. Nyāya
    2. Vaiśeṣika
    3. Sāṅkhya
    4. Yoga
    5. Pūrvamīmāṃsā
    6. Vedānta
      1. Bhedābheda
      2. Commonalities of the Three Famous Commentaries
      3. Advaita
      4. Viśiṣṭādvaita
      5. Dvaita
    7. Classical Hindu Philosophy in the Context of Indian Philosophy
  4. Stage Three: Neo-Hinduism
  5. Conclusion: the Status of Hindu Philosophy
  6. References and Further Readings
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Introduction

“Hinduism” is a term used to designate a body of religious and philosophical beliefs indigenous to the Indian subcontinent. Hinduism is one of the world’s oldest religious traditions, and it is founded upon what is often regarded as the oldest surviving text of humanity: the Vedas. It is a religion practiced the world over. Countries with Hindu majorities include Bali, India, Mauritius and Nepal, though countries in Asia, Africa, Europe and the Americas have sizable minorities of practicing Hindus.

For historical and doctrinal reasons, some modern Indologists have adopted the convention of distinguishing between traditional Hinduism and “Neo-Hinduism” (cf. Hacker; Halbfass, India and Europe). Against this distinction, “Hinduism” is often reserved for some traditional philosophical and religious beliefs indigenous to the Indian subcontinent, and “Neo-Hinduism” is reserved for a modern set of religious and philosophical beliefs articulated by Indians who defined their religious views in contrast to a perceived Western preoccupation with scientism and sectarianism. For many Western educated individuals in the world today (particularly those who count themselves as “Hindus”), the philosophy captured under the term “Neo-Hinduism” designates their religious and philosophical belief set. While Neo-Hinduism is no doubt a part of the Hindu philosophical tradition, it constitutes a distinct development within the tradition. Here the terms “Neo-Hindu” and “Neo-Hinduism” will be used to single out this recent development of Hindu thought. “Hindu” and “Hinduism” will be used to designate any portion of the tradition. The label “Hindu philosophy” will be reserved for the philosophical elements of Hinduism.

The history of Hindu philosophy can be divided roughly into three, largely overlapping stages:

  1. Non-Systematic Hindu Philosophy, found in the Vedas and secondary religious texts (beginning in the 2nd millennia B.C.E.)
  2. Systematic Hindu Philosophy (beginning in the 1st millennia B.C.E.)
  3. Neo-Hindu Philosophy (beginning in the 19th century C.E.)

Hindu philosophy is difficult to narrow down to a definite doctrine because Hinduism itself, as a religion, resists identification with any well worked out doctrine. This may not be so surprising when we consider that the term “Hinduism” itself is not in traditional, pre-colonial Hindu literature. Prior to the modern period of history, authors that we think of as Hindus did not identify themselves by that title. The term itself is not rooted in any Indian language, but likely derives from the Persian term “sindhu,” cognate with the Latin “Indus,” used to refer to inhabitants of the Indian subcontinent (cf. Monier-Williams p.1298). Its historical usage is thus an umbrella term that identifies many related religious and philosophical traditions that are not clearly part of another Indian tradition, such as Buddhism and Jainism.

Owing to the geographical proximity of the views grouped under the term “Hinduism” we might expect that such views have some comprehensive doctrinal similarities. However, many of the ideas and practices commonly associated with Hinduism can be found in adjacent Indian religio-philosophical traditions, such as Buddhism and Jainism. Moreover, some of them are not common to all Hindu thinkers. The rich diversity of views within the Hindu tradition that overlap with non-Hindu views makes identifying “Hinduism” on the basis of a shared, comprehensive doctrine difficult if not impossible.

a. Defining Hinduism: Salient Features and False Starts

i. Karma

A common thesis associated with Hinduism is the view that events in a person’s life are determined by karma. The term literally means “action,” but in this context it denotes the moral, psychological spiritual and physical causal consequences of morally significant past choices. If it were the case that a belief in karma is common to all Hindu philosophies, and only Hindu philosophies, then we would have a clear doctrinal criterion for identifying Hinduism. This approach is unsuccessful because a belief in karma is common to many of India’s religious traditions—including Buddhism and Jainism. Moreover, it is not evident that it is embraced by all sources that we consider Hindu. For instance, the doctrine of karma seems to be absent from much of the Vedas. Karma is not a sufficient criterion of Hinduism, and it likely is not a necessary condition either.

ii. Polytheism

Polytheism, or the worship of many deities, is often identified as a distinctive feature of Hinduism. However, it is not true that all Hindus are polytheists. Indeed, many Hindus belong to sectarian traditions (such as Vaiṣṇavism, or Śaivism) that specify that only one deity (Viṣṇu, in the first case, or Śiva, in the second), or a very small set of deities, are genuine Gods, and subordinate the rest of the pantheon associated with Hinduism to the status of exalted beings. We could identify Hinduism as the set of religious views that recognize the divinity or exalted status of a core set of Indic deities, but this too would not provide a way to separate Hinduism from Buddhism and Jainism. Many “Hindu” deities, such as Brahmā (the Creator God), are recognized and treated as exalted beings and deities in the Buddhist Pāli Canon (cf. Majjhima Nikāya II.130; Saṃyutta Nikāya I.421-23). Likewise, the popular Hindu deity Kṛṣṇa is treated in the early Jain tradition as a Jain Ford Maker, and a tradition of worshiping the Goddess Lakṣmī (a goddess revered by Hindus as the consort of Viṣṇu) continues amongst Jains today (see Dundas pp. 98, 183). Belief in certain deities might constitute a necessary condition of Hinduism, but it is not a sufficient criterion.

iii. Puruṣārthas : dharma, artha, kāma and mokṣa

Hinduism might be identified with a core set of values, commonly known in Hindu literature as the puruṣārthas , or ends of persons. The puruṣārthas are a set of four values: dharma, artha, kāma and mokṣa. “Dharma” in the Puruṣārtha scheme and throughout much of Hindu literature stands for the ethical or moral (in action, or in character, hence it is often translated as “duty”), “artha” for economic wealth, “kāma” for pleasure, and “mokṣa” for soteriological liberation from rebirth and imperfection. Hinduism, one might argue, is any religious view from the Indian subcontinent that recognizes that human beings ought to maximize the puruṣārthas at the appropriate time and in the appropriate ways. This approach will not do, for not all views that we consider Hindu recognize the validity of all of these values. While many of the systematic Hindu philosophical schools seem to be critical of kāma, understood as sensual pleasure, the early stage of one Hindu philosophical school—Pūrvamīmāṃsā—does not recognize the idea that there is anything like liberation as a possible end for individuals.

The puruṣārthas are important for any study of Indian thought, however, for they constitute the value-theoretic backdrop against which Indian thinkers articulated their views: typically, most all Indian philosophers recognized the validity of all four values, though some, like the Materialists (Cārvāka) are on record as holding that kāma or sensual pleasure is the only dharma or morality (Guṇaratna p.276), and that there is no such thing as liberation. Others such as the early Pūrvamīmāṃsā ignore the idea of personal liberation but emphasizes the importance of dharma. As all Hindu philosophical schools appear to recognize something that might count as “dharma” or morality, we might attempt to understand Hinduism in terms of its allegiance to a particular moral theory. This attempt to define Hinduism in terms of a simple doctrine fails, for some of what passes for dharma (ethics, morality or duty) in the context of particular schools of Hindu philosophical thought share much with non-Hindu, but Indian schools of thought. This is particularly apparent in the case of the Hindu philosophical school of Yoga, whose moral theory shares much with Jainism, and with Buddhist Mahāyāna thought. Also, there is sufficient variation amongst the schools of Hindu philosophy on moral matters that makes defining Hindu philosophy solely on the basis of a shared moral doctrine impossible. If there is a core moral theory common to all Hindu schools, it is likely to be so thin that it will also be found as a component of other Indian religions. Thus, an ethical theory might be a necessary criterion of Hinduism, but it is insufficient.

iv. Varna (Caste)

Finally, one might attempt to identify Hinduism with the institution of a caste system that carves society into a specified set of classes whose natures dispose them and obligate them to certain occupations in life. More specifically, one might argue that Hinduism is any belief system wedded to the idea that any well ordered society is composed of four castes: Brahmins (priestly or scholarly caste), Kṣatriya (marshal or royal caste), Vaiśyas (merchant caste) and Sūdras (labor caste).
This approach to defining Hinduism is essentially a rehabilitation of the idea that some core moral doctrine cements Hinduism together. There are two problems with this approach that renders it unhelpful to identifying Hinduism. First, anyone familiar with Indian society will know that caste (“varna,” or more commonly “jāti”) is an Indian phenomenon that is not restricted to Hindu sections of society. One might argue that the approving use of the term “Brahmin” in Buddhist and Jain texts shows that even these socially critical movements were comfortable with a caste structured society provided that obligations and privileges accorded to the various castes were justly distributed (cf. Dhammapada ch. XXVI; cf. Sūtrakṛtānga I.xii.11-21). Secondly, and more importantly, it is not clear that caste is philosophically important to many schools that are conventionally understood under the heading of “Hindu philosophy.” Some schools, such as Yoga, appear to be implicitly critical of life in conventional society guided by the values of social and ecological domination, while some schools, such as Advaita Vedānta, are openly critical of the idea that caste morality has any relevance to a spiritually serious aspirant.

b. A Textual Definition of Hinduism and Hindu Philosophy

Because the term “Hinduism” has no roots in the self-conceptualization of people that we in retrospect label as “Hindus,” we are unlikely to find anything very significant in the way of philosophical doctrine that is essential to Hinduism. Yet, the term continues to be useful because it centers on a stance that separates Hindu thinkers from Buddhist, Jain, or Sikh thinkers. The stance in question is openness to the provisional validity of a core set of Hindu texts. At the center of the canon of Hindu texts is the Vedas, followed by a large body of literature of secondary religious importance, which largely derive their legitimacy from Vedic thought. Non-systematic Hindu philosophy is comprised of the philosophical elements of the primary and secondary bodies of canonical Hindu texts, while the systematic Hindu philosophies, which also adopt the congenial disposition towards the Vedas, find their definitive expressions in formal philosophical texts authored by professional philosophers. Finally, Neo-Hindu philosophy of late likewise adopts a positive disposition to the Vedas, and hence constitutes the latest offering in the history of Hindu philosophy.

2. Stage One: Non-Systematic Hindu Philosophy: The Religious Texts

a. The Four Vedas

The Vedas are a large corpus, originally committed to memory and transmitted orally from teacher to student. The term “veda” means "knowledge" or "wisdom" and embodies what was likely regarded by its original attendants as the sum-total of the knowledge of their people. On the basis of linguistic variations in the corpus, contemporary scholars are of the opinion that the Vedas were composed at various points during approximately a 900 year span that can be no later than 1500 B.C.E. to 600 B.C.E.. The Vedas are composed in an Indo-European language that is loosely referred to as Sanskrit, but much of it is in an ancient precursor to Sanskrit, more properly called Vedic.

The Vedic corpus is comprised of four works each called “Vedas.” The four Vedas are Ṛg Veda, Sāma Veda, Yajur Veda and Atharva Veda, respectively. Each of the four Vedas is edited into four distinct sections: Mantras, Brāhmanas, Āraṇyakas, and Upaniṣads.

i. Karma Khaṇḍa or Action Section of the Vedas

The main portion of the Veda (which the term “Veda” most properly refers to) consists of mantras, or sacred chants and incantations. A section called the Brāhmanas, which contains ritual instruction, and speculative discussions on the meaning of Vedic rituals, follows this. These first two portions comprise what is often called the karma khaṇḍa or “action portion” of the Vedas, or alternatively, the Pūrvamīmāṃsā ("former inquiry"). (The philosophical school of Pūrvamīmāṃsā takes its name from its focus on the early part of the Vedas.)

Many of the hymns of the karma khaṇḍa ask for special favors from deities, and emphasize the worldly rewards of artha (economic prosperity) and kāma (sensual pleasure) that come from propitiating gods through prescribed sacrifices. However, the earlier portion of the Vedas is not entirely devoid of lofty or philosophical significance. Many of the mantras resurface in the latter portion of the Vedas as dense expressions of metaphysical theses. Moreover, many portions of the karma khaṇḍa elaborate the significance of the various Vedic deities, which surpass the role that could be attributed to them in a polytheistic context. Instead, what one finds frequently is the elevation of a single deity to the level of the cosmic soul (for example, see the Śrī Rudra).

A recurrent cosmological and ethical vision appears to emerge in the karma khaṇḍa. This is the idea that the universe is a closed ethical system, supported by a system of reciprocal sacrifice and obligation. In this context, the karma khaṇḍa promotes the practice of animal sacrifices to the gods, to ensure that conditions on earth are livable and fruitful for all of its inhabitants. A related doctrine that begins to emerge in portions of the karma khaṇḍa is the four-fold caste system that sets out strict obligations for all to fulfill, along with the idea that the caste-social order is divinely ordained. This is most clearly related in the Puruṣa Sūkta, a section of mantras from the Ṛg Veda. According to the Puruṣa Sūkta, the universe, as we know it, is a result of the self-sacrifice of a Cosmic Person (an ultimate God, later identified with Viṣṇu or Śiva, depending upon sectarian contexts). Upon being bound and sacrificed by the gods, the various portions of the Cosmic Person become the various castes: the head becomes the Brahmins, the arms become the Ksatriya caste, the thighs become the Vaiśya caste, and the feet become the Sūdra caste. While the caste system may be a pervasively Indian phenomenon, the idea that the caste system is divinely ordained appears to be found in Hindu philosophies in proportion to the weight they give to the authority of the karma khaṇḍa.

ii. Jñana Khaṇḍa or Knowledge Section of the Vedas

The karma khaṇḍa is followed by the Āraṇyakas, or forest books, which for the most part eschew rituals, and are far more speculative. After the Āraṇyakas come the section of the Vedas known as the “ Upaniṣads,” which consist of a dialogue between a teacher and student on metaphysical, axiological and cosmological issues. Whereas the goal of the early portion of the Vedas is action, the goal of the latter portion of the Vedas is jñāna (knowledge) of Brahman (a neuter term for the Ultimate, depicted in the Upaniṣads as the ultimate God). Further, the Upaniṣads identify Brahman with Ātma (Self) and suggest that knowing this entity will save one from all sorrow (cf. Muṇdaka Upaniṣad 7) and result in liberation. Brahman or Ātma is additionally presented as the omniscient, omnipotent and omnipresent entity hidden from plain view, but known through philosophical speculation that is driven by dissatisfaction with earthly rewards. This latter part of the Vedas is often referred to as the uttara mīmāṃsā ("higher inquiry"), or the vedānta, which means "end of the Vedas." Alternatively, it is known as the jñāna khaṇḍa, or "knowledge portion" of the Vedas. (The Hindu schools known as Vedānta take their name from their focus on this portion of the Vedas). The sustained theme of the uttara mīmāṃsā is that the cosmos as we know it is the result of the causal efficacy of Brahman, or Ātma, that the results of works are ephemeral, and that knowledge of reality brings everlasting reward. The uttara mīmāṃsā is characterized by a pervasive dissatisfaction with ritual (cf. Muṇdaka Upaniṣad I.ii.10).

The specific relationship between the individual and Brahman, or Ātma, is a matter of controversy amongst commentators on the latter portions of the Vedas. Four major commentarial schools evolved to interpret the import of the later portions of the Vedas. This confirms the suspicion that the actual position of the Upaniṣads is less than clear, or at least debatable. (See Vedānta.)

b. Secondary Texts: Smṛti Literature

On many traditional Hindu accounts (specifically the account found in the Pūrvamīmāṃsā and Vedānta schools), the Vedas are regarded as “śruti”, "heard" or revealed texts, and are contrasted with smṛti or remembered texts. The smṛti texts are far more numerous, but purport to be based upon the learning of the Vedas. Unlike the Vedas, the smṛtis were traditionally regarded as appropriate for general consumption, while the Vedas were regarded as the sole preserve of the high castes. The smṛti literature, as a rule, was originally authored in Sanskrit. Over time, however, translations into vernacular languages became popular, and additional texts were authored in vernaculars.

The tradition of smṛti literature stretches back to the end of the Vedic period, and in some ways is still very much alive today. The smṛti texts can all be read as attempting to unify the seemingly divergent goals of the action section of the Vedas (being morality, or dharma) and the knowledge section of the Vedas (being liberation or mokṣa). The overall strategy offered in the various smṛti texts is to affirm a moral scheme known traditionally as varna āśrama dharma, or the morality of caste (varna) and station in life (āśrama). This scheme reconciles the demands of dharma and mokṣa, as well as artha and kāma, by apportioning different stages of life to the pursuit of different ends. At the end of childhood, and before the beginning of adolescence, an individual is typically expected to be a celibate student (brahmacarya), and learn one caste’s ways. Then at an appropriate age they are to marry and become a householder (gṛhastha). During this stage an individual is permitted and expected to pursue the ends of kāma or sensual pleasure through married life and artha or economic prosperity through caste occupations. After raising a family, a couple is to retire to the forest and become forest dwellers (vānaprastha), to facilitate their transition from a life focused on kāma and artha to a life geared towards liberation. Finally, individuals give up all possessions, renounce society and become a ascetic (sannyāsa) at which point they are to focus solely on mokṣa or spiritual liberation.

There are three prominent varieties of smṛti literature that are important to the study of Hindu philosophy. Though they for the most part express and extol the doctrine of varna āśrama dharma, they are composed in different styles, and with different audiences in mind.

i. Itihāsas

The best known of the smṛti literature are the great Hindu epics, such as the Mahābhārata and Rāmāyana. The focal plot of the Mahābhārata is a fratricidal war between the children of two princes. The deity Kṛṣṇa figures prominently in this epic, as a mutual cousin of both warring factions, though he is not the protagonist. The Rāmāyana is an account of the life story of the crown prince Rāma up until he vanquishes the tyrant King Rāvana and successfully rescues his wife and the crown princess Sītā from Rāvana’s grips. Both Kṛṣṇa and Rāma are traditionally regarded as human incarnations of Viṣṇu. Both the Mahābhārata and Rāmāyana are grouped under the heading of itihāsa (‘thus spoken’) literature. The focal events of the two epics likely occurred between 1000 B.C.E. and 700 A.D. (Thapar p. 31) though the epics themselves appear to have gone through a long process of revision and evolution before their final Sanskrit versions appear on the scene in the first two centuries of the common era.

Itihāsas, though recorded in the form of a narrative, are littered with philosophical discussions on cosmology, and ethics. The most philosophically famous portion of the itihāsa literature is the Bhagavad Gītā. The Bhagavad Gītā forms a portion of the Mahābhārata, but owing to its importance in the tradition it is often regarded as a stand-alone text.

ii. Bhagavad Gītā

The Bhagavad Gītā consists of a discourse given by Kṛṣṇa on the eve of the battle of the fratricidal war of the Mahābhārata to his cousin Arjuna, who becomes despondent at the thought of engaging in a war whose main aim is resting control over the throne, at the expense of the destruction of his family. Kṛṣṇa exhorts Arjuna to do his duty as a Ksatriya and fight the war that he has been charged with (Bhagavad Gītā 2:31). For “[b]etter is one’s own duty, though ill done, than the duty of another well done….” (Bhagavad Gītā 18:47; cf. Manu X. 97). In keeping with the general theme of the smṛti literature, Kṛṣṇa focuses on reconciling the goal of mokṣa with that of dharma. Kṛṣṇa’s first solution to the problem of the conflict of dharma and mokṣa involves doing one’s duty with a strong deontological consciousness, which attends to duty for duty’s sake, and not for its rewards. This deontological attitude not only perfects moral action, on Kṛṣṇa’s account, but it also constitutes true renunciation, which is a prerequisite to mokṣa. Kṛṣṇa calls the deontological renunciation of rewards of dutiful action karma yoga, or the discipline (yoga) of action (karma) (Bhagavad Gītā ch.3). This is not the only type of yoga that Kṛṣṇa prescribes. He also propounds what he identifies as distinct yogas (Bhagavad Gītā chs. 4-11) that might be grouped under the heading of jñāna yoga, or the discipline (yoga) of knowledge (jñāna), whereby one develops a detached attitude towards the fruits of works through knowledge of the excellences and unchanging nature of the transcendent (sometimes spoken of as “Brahman” in this text), and the ephemeral and temporary nature of worldly accomplishments. To this end, Kṛṣṇa calls upon the philosophy of Sāṅkhya and Yoga, as well as the philosophical concepts of the Upaniṣads to explicate the nature of the changing and the transcendent. Finally, Kṛṣṇa also prescribes what he calls bhakti yoga or the “discipline (yoga) of devotion (bhakti)” (Bhagavad Gītā chs. 12-18). Whereas in karma yoga, one merely gives up fruits of actions, in bhakti yoga one offers the fruits of one’s actions to God. Whereas in jñāna yoga one pursues knowledge for its own sake, in bhakti yoga one pursues knowledge for the sake of a loving relationship with the Ultimate. Kṛṣṇa appears to hold that any of the ways that he prescribes will result in liberation for all three varieties of yogas will ensure that the obstacle to liberation—attachment to fruits of actions—is over come.

iii. Purāṇas

Purāna” means history and is the term applied to a group of texts that share a few features: (a) they typically provide a detailed history of the origin of the various gods and the Universe, and (b) they are written in praise of the exploits of a particular deity. Unlike the itihāsas, the Purāṇas are not restricted to incarnations of deities, but describe the activities of the deities, including their incarnations. The Purāṇa literature comes down to us from a time that post dates the composition of the Vedas, though their precise dates of composition are not known (cf. Thapar p.29). There are many Purāṇas, though the most famous is likely the Bhāgavata Purāṇa.

The Bhāgavata Purāṇa is distinguished amongst Purāṇas for being regarded by Gaudiya Vaiṣṇavism, founded by the medieval Bengali saint Caitanya, as the ultimate revelation on all doctrinal matters. This tradition has come into prominence in recent times in the form of the International Society for Kṛṣṇa Consciousness, commonly known as the Hare Kṛṣṇa movement. According to the Bhāgavata Purāṇa, the Ultimate (Brahman) is both identical with and distinct from creation: on this account, Brahman converts itself into the universe but maintains a distinct identity all the same. The Bhāgavata Purāṇa also identifies Viṣṇu with Brahman, and holds that bhakti (devotion) is the chief means of attaining liberation, which consists in the personal absorption of the individual (jīva) in Brahman. The Bhāgavata Purāṇa thus presents one of the famous and enduring theistic expressions of the Bhedābheda philosophy. In the way of ethics, the Bhāgavata Purāṇa strays little from the Varna āśrama dharma found in most smṛti literature (Bhāgavata Purāṇa I.ii.9-12), though it advocates what it calls “bhāgavata dharma” (bhāgavata ethic) which is a combination of the karma yoga and bhakti yoga of the Gītā supplemented with an emphasis on living the life characteristic of a devotee of Kṛṣṇa as described in the Bhāgavata Purāṇa (XI.iii.23-31).

iv. Dharmaśāstra

The term “dharmaśāstra” literally means treaties or science (śāstra) of dharma. The term refers to a corpus of literature clearly authored by Brahmins with the aim of reinforcing a particular conception of Varna āśrama dharma: a moral theory that critics will note ensures that Brahmins are allotted a privileged or crowning position in the caste scheme. The dharmaśāstras contain many features of other smṛti literature that make them philosophically interesting.

Like the Purāṇa literature, many of the dharmaśāstras provide accounts of the origins of the universe, and sometimes they delve into the question of the means to liberation. Their dominant concern however is to prescribe the specific duties and privileges of each caste. After attending to the political question of the proper ordering of society, the dharmaśāstras typically focus on the matter of prayaścitta, or ritual expiation (see Kane vol.4 ch.1 pp. 1-40).

The idea of ritual expiation can be understood as a procedure concerned with alleviating ritual impurity. However, it also has clear moral implications: prayaścittas are prescribed for every manner of offence, and if an agent undertakes the appropriate prayaścitta, they can atone for their moral transgressions. A prayaścitta can take the form of a ritual, an act of charity, or corporal punishment. The idea that one can ritually atone for moral transgressions is unique to the dharmaśāstras, and related texts in the history of Hindu philosophy.

3. Stage Two: Systematic Hindu Philosophy: the Darśanas

Core Hindu canonical texts—the Vedas—form the textual backdrop against which many of the systematic Hindu philosophies are articulated. However, they do not exhaust the import of Hindu philosophy for two main reasons. First, the Vedas are not composed with the intention of being systematic treaties on philosophical issues. They leave many issues of philosophy relatively untouched. Secondly, the core Hindu canonical texts are not canonical in the same way for all Hindus. By and large, those we tend to regard as Hindu accord some type of provisional authority to both the Vedas, and the secondary Vedic literature. However, the authority accorded is something that Hindu thinkers have disagreed upon. Some of the foundational works in systematic Hindu philosophy do not explicitly mention the Vedas (for example, the Sāṅkhya Kārikā), leaving the impression that these schools were tolerant of the authority of the Vedas, but not philosophically wedded to it in any deep sense.

The term “darśana” in Sanskrit translates as "vision" and is conventionally regarded as designating what we are inclined to look upon as systematic philosophical views. The history of Indian philosophy is replete with darśanas. The number of darśanas to be found in the history of Indian philosophy depends largely on the organizational question of how one is to enumerate darśanas: how much difference between expressions of philosophical views can be tolerated before we are inclined to count texts as expressing distinct darśanas? The question seems particularly pertinent in cases like Buddhist and Jain philosophy, which have all had rich philosophical histories. The issue is relatively easier to settle in the context of Hindu philosophy, for a convention has developed over the centuries to count systematic Hindu philosophy as being comprised of six (āstika, or Veda recognizing) darśanas. The six darśanas are: Nyāya, Vaiśeṣika, Sāṅkhya, Yoga, Pūrvamīmāṃsā, and Vedānta.

As a rule, systematic Indian philosophy (Hinduism, Jainism and Buddhism) was recorded in Sanskrit, the pan-Indian language of scholarship, after the end of the Vedic period. While scholars are confident about the approximate dates that the texts of systematic Indian philosophy handed down to us were written (cf. Potter, “Bibliography,” Encyclopaedia of Indian Philosophies, vol.1) scholars are not in many cases as confident about the age of the schools themselves. Moreover, most of the schools of Hindu philosophy have existed side by side. Thus, the order of explication of the systematic schools of Hindu philosophy follows the conventional order of explication and not any particular historical order.

a. Nyāya

The term "nyāya" traditionally had the meaning "formal reasoning," though in later times it also came to be used for reasoning in general, and by extension, the legal reasoning of traditional Indian law courts. Opponents of the Nyāya school of philosophy frequently reduce it to the status of an arm of Hindu philosophy devoted to questions of logic and rhetoric. While reasoning is very important to Nyāya, this school also had important things to say on the topic of epistemology, theology and metaphysics, rendering it a comprehensive and autonomous school of Indian philosophy.

The Nyāya school of Hindu philosophy has had a long and illustrious history. The founder of this school is the sage Gautama (2nd cent. C.E.)—not to be confused with the Buddha, who on many accounts had the name “Gautama” as well. Nyāya went through at least two stages in the history of Indian philosophy. At an earlier, purer stage, proponents of Nyāya sought to elaborate a philosophy that was distinct from contrary darśanas. At a later stage, some Nyāya and Vaiśeṣika authors (such as Śaṅkara-Misra, 15th cent. C.E.) became increasingly syncretistic and viewed their two schools as sister darśanas. As well, at the latter stages of the Nyāya tradition, the philosopher Gaṅgeśa (14th cent. C.E.) narrowed the focus to the epistemological issues discussed by the earlier authors, while leaving off metaphysical matters and so initiated a new school, which came to be known as Navya Nyāya, or “New” Nyāya. Our focus will be mainly on classical, non-syncretic, Nyāya.

According to the first verse of the Nyāya-Sūtra, the Nyāya school is concerned with shedding light on sixteen topics: pramāna (epistemology), prameya (ontology), saṃśaya (doubt), prayojana (axiology, or “purpose”), dṛṣṭānta(paradigm cases that establish a rule), Siddhānta (established doctrine), avayava (premise of a syllogism), tarka (reductio ad absurdum), nirnaya (certain beliefs gained through epistemically respectable means), vāda (appropriately conducted discussion), jalpa (sophistic debates aimed at beating the opponent, and not at establishing the truth), vitaṇḍa(a debate characterized by one party’s disinterest in establishing a positive view, and solely with refutation of the opponent’s view), hetvābhāsa (persuasive but fallacious arguments), chala (unfair attempt to contradict a statement by equivocating its meaning), jāti (an unfair reply to an argument based on a false analogy), and nigrahasthāna (ground for defeat in a debate) (Nyāya-Sūtra and Vātsyāyana’s Bhāṣya I.1.1-20).

With respect to the question of epistemology, the Nyāya-Sūtra recognizes four avenues of knowledge: these are perception, inference, analogy, and verbal testimony of reliable persons. Perception arises when the senses make contact with the object of perception. Inference comes in three varieties: pūrvavat (a priori), śeṣavat (a posteriori) and sāmanyatodṛṣṭa (common sense) (Nyāya-Sūtra I.1.3–7).

The Nyāya's acceptance of both arguments from analogy and testimony as means of knowledge, allows it to accomplish two theological goals. First, it allows Nyāya to claim that the Veda’s are valid owing to the reliability of their transmitters (Nyāya-Sūtra II.1.68). Secondly, the acceptance of arguments from analogy allows the Nyāya philosophers to forward a natural theology based on analogical reasoning. Specifically, the Nyāya tradition is famous for the argument that God’s existence can be known for (a) all created things resemble artifacts, and (b) just as every artifact has a creator, so too must all of creation have a creator (Udayanācārya and Haridāsa Nyāyālaṃkāra I.3-4).

The metaphysics that pervades the Nyāya texts is both realistic and pluralistic. On the Nyāya view the plurality of reasonably believed things exist and have an identity independently of their contingent relationship with other objects. This applies as much to mundane objects, as it does to the self, and God. The ontological model that appears to pervade Nyāya metaphysical thinking is that of atomism, the view that reality is composed of indecomposable simples (cf. Nyāya-Sūtra IV.2.4.16).

Nyāya’s treatment of logical and rhetorical issues, particularly in the Nyāya Sūtra, consists in an extended inventory acceptable and unacceptable argumentation. Nyāya is often depicted as primarily concerned with logic, but it is more accurately thought of as being concerned with argumentation.

b. Vaiśeṣika

The Vaiśeṣika system was founded by the ascetic, Kaṇāḍa (1st cent. C.E.). His name translates literally as “atom-eater.” On some accounts Kaṇāḍa gained this name because of the pronounced ontological atomism of his philosophy (Vaiśeṣika Sūtra VII.1.8), or because he restricted his diet to grains picked from the field. If the Nyāya system can be characterized as being predominantly concerned with matters of argumentation, the Vaiśeṣika system can be characterized as overwhelmingly concerned with metaphysical questions. Like Nyāya, Vaiśeṣika in its later stages turned into a syncretic movement, wedded to the Nyāya system. Here the focus will be primarily on the early Vaiśeṣika system, with the help of some latter day commentaries.

Kaṇāḍa’s Vaiśeṣika Sūtra’s opening verses are both dense and very revealing about the scope of the system. The opening verse states that the topic of the text is the elaboration of dharma (ethics or morality). According to the second verse, dharma is that which results not only in abhyudaya but also the Supreme Good (niḥreyasa), commonly known as mokṣa (liberation) in Indian philosophy (Vaiśeṣika Sūtra I.1.1-2). The term “abhyudaya” designates the values extolled in the early, action portion of the Vedas, such as artha (economic prosperity) and kāma (sensual pleasure). From the second verse it thus appears that the Vaiśeṣika system regards morality as providing the way for the remaining puruṣārthas . A reading of the obscure third verse provided by the latter day philosopher Śaṅkara-Misra (15th cent. C.E.) states that the validity of the Vedas rests on the fact that it is an explication of dharma. (Misra’s alternative explanation is that the phrase can be read as asserting that the validity of the Vedas derives from the authority of its author, God—this is a syncretistic reading of the Vaiśeṣika Sūtra, influenced by Nyāya philosophy.) (Śaṅkara-Misra’s Vaiśeṣika Sūtra Bhāṣya I.1.2, p.7).

From the densely worded fourth verse, it appears that the Vaiśeṣika system regards itself as an explication of dharma. The Vaiśeṣika system holds that the elaboration or knowledge of the particular expression of dharma (which is the Vaiśeṣika system) consists of knowledge of six categories: substance (dravya), attribute (guṇa), action (karma), genus (sāmānya), particularity (viśeṣa), and the relationship of inherence between attributes and their substances (samavāya) (Vaiśeṣika Sūtra I.1.4).

The dense fourth verse of the Vaiśeṣika Sūtra gives expression to a thorough going metaphysical realism. On the Vaiśeṣika account, universals (sāmānya) as well as particularity (viśeṣa) are realities, and these have a distinct reality from substances, attributes, actions, and the relation of inherence, which all have their own irreducible reality.

The metaphysical import of the fourth verse potentially obscures the fact that the Vaiśeṣika system sets itself the task of elaborating dharma. Given the weight that the Vaiśeṣika Sūtra gives to ontological matters, it is inviting to treat its insistence that it seeks to elaborate dharma as quite irrelevant to its overall concern. However, subsequent authors in the Vaiśeṣika tradition have drawn attention to the significance of dharma to the overall system.

Śaṅkara-Misra suggests that dharma understood in its particular presentation in the Vaiśeṣika system is a kind of sagely forbearance or withdrawal from the world (Śaṅkara-Misra’s Vaiśeṣika Sūtra Bhāṣya I.1.4. p.12). In a similar vein, another commentator, Chandrakānta (19th cent. C.E.), states:

Dharma presents two aspects, that is under the characteristic of Pravṛitti or worldly activity, and the characteristic of Nivṛitti or withdrawal from worldly activity. Of these, Dharma characterized by Nivṛitti, brings forth tattva–jñana or knowledge of truths, by means of removal of sins and other blemishes. (Chandrakānta p.15.)

Thus the view of the commentators appears to be that the Vaiśeṣika system, which yields “knowledge of truths,” “knowledge of the categories,” or “knowledge of the essences” (cf. Śaṅkara-Misra, p.5) is a moral virtue of the person who is initiated into the system—that is, a “particular dharma” of that person. Hence, in elaborating the nature of reality, the Vaiśeṣika system seeks to extinguish the ignorance that obstructs the effects of dharma, and it thus also constitutes a moral virtue of the proponent of the Vaiśeṣika system. This virtue will not only yield the fruits of works, such as kāma and artha (which the Vaiśeṣika sage will know to appreciate at a distance) but it will also yield the highest good: mokṣa.

c. Sāṅkhya

The term “Sāṅkhya” means ‘enumeration’ and it suggests a methodology of philosophical analysis. On many accounts, Sāṅkhya is the oldest of the systematic schools of Indian philosophy. It is attributed to the legendary sage Kapila of antiquity, though we have no extant work left to us by him. His views are recounted in many smṛti texts, such as the Bhāgavata Purāṇa and the Bhagavad Gītā, but the Sāṅkhya system appears to stretch back to the end of the Vedic period itself. Key concepts of the Sāṅkhya system appear in the Upaniṣads (Kaṭha Upaniṣad I.3.10–11), suggesting that it is an indigenous Indian philosophical school that developed congenially in parallel with the Vedic tradition. Its relative antiquity appears to be confirmed by the references to the school in classical Jain writings (for instance, Sūtrakṛtānga I.i.1.13), which are known for their antiquity. Unlike many of the other systematic schools of Hindu philosophy, the Sāṅkhya system does not explicitly attempt to align itself with the authority of the Vedas (cf. Sāṅkhya Kārikā 2).

The oldest systematic writing on Sāṅkhya that we have is Īśvarakṛṣna’s Sāṅkhya Kārikā (4th cent. C.E.). In it we have the classic Sāṅkhya ontology and metaphysic set out, along with its theory of agency.

According to the Sāṅkhya system, the cosmos is the result of the mutual contact of two distinct metaphysical categories: Prakṛti (Nature), and Puruṣa (person). Prakṛti, or Nature, is the material principle of the cosmos and is comprised of three guṇas, or "qualities." These are sattva, rajas, and tamas. Sattva is illuminating, buoyant and a source of pleasure; rajas is actuating, propelling and a source of pain; tamas is still, enveloping and a source of indifference (Sāṅkhya Kārikā 12-13).

Puruṣa, in contrast, has the quality of consciousness. It is the entity that the personal pronoun “I” actually refers to. It is eternally distinct from Nature, but it enters into complex configurations of Nature (biological bodies) in order to experience and to have knowledge. According to the Sāṅkhya tradition, mind, mentality, intellect or Mahat (the Great one) is not a part of the Puruṣa, but the result of the complex organization of matter, or the guṇas. Mentality is the closest thing in Nature to Puruṣa, but it is still a natural entity, rooted in materiality. Puruṣa, in contrast, is a pure witness. It lacks the ability to be an agent. Thus, on the Sāṅkhya account, when it seems as though we as persons are making decisions, we are mistaken: it is actually our natural constitution comprised by the guṇas that make the decision. The Puruṣa does nothing but lend consciousness to the situation (Sāṅkhya Kārikā 12-13, 19, 21).

The contact of Prakṛti and Puruṣa, on the Sāṅkhya account, is not a chance occurrence. Rather, the two principles make contact so that Puruṣa can come to have knowledge of its own nature. A Puruṣa comes to have such knowledge when sattva, the illuminating guṇa, assumes a governing position in a bodily constitution. The moment that this knowledge comes about, a Puruṣa becomes liberated. The Puruṣa is no longer bound by the actions and choices of its body’s constitution. However, liberation consists in the end of karma tying the Puruṣa to Prakṛti: it does not coincide with the complete annihilation of past karma, which would consist in the disentangling of a Puruṣa from Prakṛti. Hence, the Sāṅkhya Kārikā likens the self-realization of the Puruṣa to a potter’s wheel, which continues to spin down, after the potter has ceased putting energy to keep the wheel in motion (Sāṅkhya Kārikā 67).

Students of ancient Western philosophy are apt to note that the Sāṅkhya guṇas, and the dualistic theory of personhood, appear to have echos in Plato (4th cent. B.C.E.). Plato held that the body is the casing of the soul (though Plato, at Phaedo 81 and Phaedrus 250c suggests it is a prison, which the Sāṅkhya system does not), and that the embodied soul is composed of three characteristics: an earthy quality geared toward menial tasks that is appetitive (corresponding to bronze), a high-spirited quality geared towards accomplishment and competition (silver), and a reflective or rational portion that is in a position to put in order the constitution of the soul (gold) (Republic 3.415, 4.435–42). Prima facie, the bronze quality appears to correspond to tamas, silver to rajas, and sattva to gold. Owing to the antiquity of the Sāṅkhya system, it is historically implausible that it was influenced by Platonistic thought. This of course invites the contrary proposal, that Plato was influenced by the Sāṅkhya system. While Indian philosophers had an important impact on the course of ancient Greek philosophy (through Pyrrho of Elis, who traveled to India in the 3rd cent. B.C.E. and was impressed by a type of dialectic nihilism characteristic of some Buddhist philosophies, promoted by gymnosophists—naked wise people—who resemble Jain monks) (see Flintoff), there is no historical evidence to suggest that Sāṅkhya thought made its way to ancient Greece. This suggests that both Plato (4th cent. B.C.E.), and the Sāṅkhya system (dating back to the 6th cent. B.C.E. in the Vedas) articulate an ancient Indo-European philosophical perspective that predates both Plato and the Sāṅkhya system, if the similarities between the two are not purely coincidental.

d. Yoga

The Yoga tradition shares much with the Sāṅkhya darśana. Like the Sāṅkhya philosophy, traces of the Yoga tradition can be found in the Upaniṣads. While the systematic expression of the Yoga philosophy comes to us from Patañjali’s Yoga Sūtra, it comes relatively late in the history of philosophy (at the end of the epic period, roughly 3rd century C.E.), the Yoga philosophy is also expressed in the Bhagavad Gītā. The Yoga philosophy shares with Sāṅkhya its dualistic cosmology. Like Sāṅkhya, the Yoga philosophy does not attempt to explicitly derive its authority from the Vedas. However, Yoga departs from Sāṅkhya on an important metaphysical and moral point—the nature of agency—and from Sāṅkhya in its emphasis on practical means to achieve liberation.

Like the Sāṅkhya tradition, the Yoga darśana holds that the cosmos is the result of the interaction of two categories: Prakṛti (Nature) and Puruṣa (Person). Like the Sāṅkhya tradition, the Yoga tradition is of the opinion that Prakṛti, or Nature, is comprised of three guṇas, or qualities. These are the same three qualities extolled in the Sāṅkhya system—tamas, rajas, and sattva—though the Yoga Sūtra refers to many of these by different terms (cf. Yoga Sūtra II.18). As with the Sāṅkhya system, liberation in the Yoga system is facilitated by the ascendance of sattva in a person’s mind, which permits enlightenment on the nature of the self.

A relatively important point of cosmological difference is that the Yoga system does not consider the Mind or the Intellect (Mahat) to be the greatest creation of Nature. A major difference between the two schools concerns Yoga’s picture of how liberation is achieved. On the Sāṅkhya account, liberation comes about by Nature enlightening the Puruṣa, for Puruṣas are mere spectators (cf. Sāṅkhya Kārikā 62). In the contexts of the Yoga darśana, the Puruṣa is not a mere spectator, but an agent: Puruṣa is regarded as the “lord of the mind” (Yoga Sūtra IV.18): for Yoga it is the effort of the Puruṣa that brings about liberation. The empowered account of Puruṣa in the Yoga system is supplemented by a detail account of the practical means by which Puruṣa can bring about its own liberation.

The Yoga Sūtra tells us that the point of yoga is to still perturbations of the mind—the main obstacle to liberation (Yoga Sūtra I.2). The practice of the Yoga philosophy comes to those with energy (Yoga Sūtra I.21). In order to facilitate the calming of the mind, the Yoga system prescribes several moral and practical means. The core of the practical import of the Yoga philosophy is what it calls the Astāṅga yoga (not to be confused with a tradition of physical yoga also called Astāṅga Yoga, popular in many yoga centers in recent times). The Astāṅga yoga sets out the eight (aṣṭa) limbs (anga) of the practice of yoga (Yoga Sūtra II.29). The eight limbs include:

  • yama – abstention from evil-doing, which specifically consists of abstention from harming others (Ahiṃsā), abstention from telling falsehoods (asatya), abstention from acquisitiveness (asteya), abstention from greed/envy (aparigraha); and sexual restraint (brahmacarya)
  • niyamas – various observances, which include the cultivation of purity (sauca), contentment (santos) and austerities (tapas)
  • āsana – posture
  • prāṇāyāma – control of breath
  • pratyāhāra – withdrawal of the mind from sense objects
  • dhāranā– concentration
  • dhyāna – meditation
  • samādhi – absorption [in the self] (Yoga Sūtra II.29-32)

According to the Yoga Sūtra, the yama rules “are basic rules.... They must be practiced without any reservations as to time, place, purpose, or caste rules” (Yoga Sūtra II.31). The failure to live a morally pure life constitutes a major obstacle to the practice of Yoga (Yoga Sūtra II.34). On the plus side, by living the morally pure life, all of one’s needs and desires are fulfilled:

When [one] becomes steadfast in… abstention from harming others, then all living creatures will cease to feel enmity in [one’s] presence. When [one] becomes steadfast in… abstention from falsehood, [one] gets the power of obtaining for [oneself] and others the fruits of good deeds, without [others] having to perform the deeds themselves. When [one] becomes steadfast in… abstention from theft, all wealth comes.… Moreover, one achieves purification of the heart, cheerfulness of mind, the power of concentration, control of the passions and fitness for vision of the Ātma [self, or Puruṣa]. “(Yoga Sūtra II.35–41)

The steadfast practice of the Astāṅga yoga results in counteracting past karmas. This culminates in a milestone-liberating event: dharmameghasamādhi (or the absorption in the cloud of virtue). In this penultimate state, the aspirant has all their past sins washed away by a cloud of dharma (virtue, or morality). This leads to the ultimate state of liberation for the yogi, kaivalya (Yoga Sūtra IV.33). “Kaivalya” translates as “aloneness.”

Critics of the Yoga system charge that it cannot be accepted on moral grounds for it has as its ultimate goal a state of isolation. On this view, kaivalya is understood literally as a state of social isolation (see Bharadwaja). The defender of the Yoga Sūtra can point out that this reading of "kaivalya" takes the final event of liberation in the Yoga system out of context. The penultimate event that paves way for the state of kaivalya is a wholly moral event (dharmameghasamādhi) and the path that leads to this morally perfecting event is itself an intrinsically moral endeavor (Astāṅga yoga, and particularly the yamas). If the concept of ‘kaivalya’ is to be understood in the context of the Yoga system’s preoccupation with morality, it seems that it must be understood as a function of moral perfection. Given the uncommon journey that the yogi takes, it is also natural to conclude that the state of kaivalya is the state characterized by having no peers, owing to the radical shift in perspective that the yogi attains through yoga. The yogi, at the point of kaivalya, no longer sees things from the perspective of individuals in society, but from the perspective of the Puruṣa. This arguably is the yogi’s loneliness.

e. Pūrvamīmāṃsā

The Pūrvamīmāṃsā school of Hindu philosophy gains its name from the portion of the Vedas that it is primarily concerned with: the earlier (pūrva) inquiry (Mīmāṃsā), or the karma khaṇḍa. In the context of Hinduism, the Pūrvamīmāṃsā school is one of the most orthodox of the Hindu philosophical schools because of its concern to elaborate and defend the contents of the early, ritually oriented part of the Vedas. Like many other schools of Indian philosophy, Pūrvamīmāṃsā takes dharma ("duty" or "ethics") as its primary focus (Mīmāṃsā Sūtra I.i.1). Unlike all other schools of Hindu philosophy, Pūrvamīmāṃsā did not take mokṣa, or liberation, as something to extol or elaborate upon. The very topic of liberation is nowhere discussed in the foundational text of this tradition, and is recognized for the first time by the medieval Pūrvamīmāṃsā author Kumārila (7th cent. C.E.) as a real objective worth pursuing in conjunction with dharma (Kumārila V.xvi.108–110).

The school of philosophy known as Pūrvamīmāṃsā has its roots in the Mīmāṃsā Sūtra, written by Jaimini (1st cent. C.E.). The Mīmāṃsā Sūtra, like the Vaiśeṣika Sūtra, begins with the assertion that its main concern is the elaboration of dharma. The second verse tells us that dharma (or the ethical) is an injunction (codana) that has the distinction (lakṣaṇa) of bringing about welfare (artha) (Mīmāṃsā Sūtra I.i.1-2).

The Pūrvamīmāṃsā system is distinguished from other Hindu philosophical schools—but for the Vedānta systems—in its view that the Vedas are epistemically foundational. Foundationalism is the view that certain knowledge claims are independently valid (which means that no further justificatory reasons are either possible or necessary to justify these claims), and moreover, that these independently valid knowledge claims are able to serve as justifications for beliefs that are based upon them. Such independently valid knowledge claims are thought to be justificatory foundations of a system of beliefs. While all Hindu philosophical schools recognize the validity of the Vedas, only the Pūrvamīmāṃsā and Vedānta systems explicitly regard the Vedas as foundational, and being in no need of further justification: “… instruction [in the Vedas] is the means of knowing it (dharma)—infallible regarding all that is imperceptible; it is a valid means of knowledge, as it is independent…” (Mīmāṃsā Sūtra I.i.5). The justificatory capacity of the Vedas serves to ground the smṛti literature, for it is the sacred tradition based on the Vedas (Mīmāṃsā Sūtra I.iii.2). If a smṛti text conflicts with the Vedas, the Vedas are to be preferred. When there is no conflict, we are entitled to presume that the Vedas stand as support for the smṛti text (Mīmāṃsā Sūtra I.iii.3).

Pūrvamīmāṃsā perhaps more than any other school of Indian philosophy made a sizable contribution to Indian debates on the philosophy of language. Some of Pūrvamīmāṃsā’s distinctive linguistic theses impact on theological matters. One distinctive thesis of the Pūrvamīmāṃsā tradition is that the relationship between a word and its referent is "inborn" and not mediated by authorial intention (Mīmāṃsā Sūtra I.i.5). The second view is that words, or verbal units (śabda), are eternal existents. This view contrasts sharply with the view taken by the Nyāya philosophers, that words have a temporary existence, and are brought in and out of existence by utterance (Nyāya Sūtra II.ii.13, cf. Mīmāṃsā Sūtra I.i.6-11). The commentator Śabara (5th cent. C.E.) explains the Pūrvamīmāṃsā view thus:

…the word is manifested (not produced) by human effort; that is to say, if, before being pronounced, the word was not manifest, it becomes manifested by the effort (or pronouncing). Thus it is found that the fact of words being “seen after effort” is equally compatible with both views.… The Word must be eternal;—why?—because its utterance is for the purpose of another…. If the word ceased to exist as soon as uttered then no one could speak of any thing to others…. Whenever the word “go” (cow) is uttered, there is a notion of all cows simultaneously. From this it follows that the word denotes the Class. And it is not possible to create the relation of the Word to a Class; because in creating the relation, the creator would have to lay down the relation by pointing to the Class; and without actually using the word “go” (which he could not use before he has laid down its relation to its denotation) in what manner could he point to the distinct class denoted by the word “go”…. (Śabara Bhāṣya on Mīmāṃsā Sūtra I.i.12-19, pp. 33–38)

Hence, the only solution to the problem of how words have their meaning, on the Pūrvamīmāṃsā account, is that they have them eternally. If they do not have their meaning eternally and independent of subjective associations between referents and words, communication would be impossible. These strikingly Platonistic positions on the nature of meaning allows the Pūrvamīmāṃsā tradition to argue that the Vedas are an eternally existing, unauthored corpus, and that it’s validity is beyond reproach: “... if the Veda be eternal its denotation cannot but be eternal; and if it be non-eternal (caused), then it can have no validity...” (Kumārila XXVII–XXXII, cf. V.xi.1).

Views in the history of Hindu philosophy that contrast with the Pūrvamīmāṃsā view, on the question of the source and nature of the Vedas, is the view implicit in the Nyāya Sūtra, and stated more clearly by the later syncretic Vaiśeṣika (and Nyāya) author Śaṅkara-Misra (Vaiśeṣika Sūtra Bhāṣya, p.7): the Vedas is the testimony of a particular person (namely God). This is a view that also appears to be echoed in the theistic schools of Vedānta, such as Viśiṣṭādvaita, where God is alluded to as the author of the Vedas (cf. Rāmānuja’s Bhagavad Gītā Bhāṣya 18:58).

f. Vedānta

Like the Pūrvamīmāṃsā tradition, the Vedānta school is concerned with explicating the contents of a particular portion of the Vedas. While the Pūrvamīmāṃsā concerns itself with the former portion of the Vedas, the Vedānta school concerns the end (anta) of the Vedas. Whereas the principal concern of the earlier portion of the Vedas is action and dharma, the principal concern of the latter portion of the Vedas is knowledge and mokṣa.

Philosophies that count technically as expressions of the Vedānta philosophy find their classical expression in a commentary on a synopsis of the Upaniṣads. The synopsis of the contents of the Upaniṣads is called the Vedānta Sūtras, or the Brahma Sūtras, and its author is Bādarāyana (1st cent. C.E.). The latter portion of the Vedas is a vast corpus that does not elaborate a single doctrine in the manner of a monograph. Rather, it is a collection of speculative texts of the Vedas with overlapping themes and images. A common thread that runs through most of the Upaniṣads is a concern to elaborate the nature of the Ultimate, or Brahman, Ātma or the Self (often equated in these texts with Brahman) and what in the subsequent tradition is known as the jīva, or the individual psychological unity. The Upaniṣads are relatively clear that Brahman stands to creation as its source and support, but its unsystematic nature leaves much to be specified in the way of doctrine. While Bādarāyana’s Brahma Sūtra is the systematization of the teachings of the Upaniṣads, many of the verses of the Brahma Sūtra are obscure and unintelligible without a commentary.

Owing to the cryptic nature of the Brahma Sūtra itself, many commentarial subtraditions have evolved in Vedānta. As a result, it is possible to misleadingly use the term “Vedānta” as though it stood for one comprehensive doctrine. Rather, the term “Vedānta” is best understood as a term embracing within it divergent philosophical views that have a common textual connection: their classical expression as a commentary on Bādarāyana’s text.

There are three famous commentaries (Bhāṣyas) on the Brahma Sūtra that shine in the history of Hindu philosophy. These are the 8th century C.E. commentary of Śaṅkara (Advaita) the 12th century C.E. commentary of Rāmānuja (Viśiṣṭādvaita) and the 13th century C.E. commentary by Madhva (Dvaita). These three are not the only commentaries. There appears to have been no less than twenty-one commentators on the Brahma Sūtra prior to Madhva (Sharma, vol.1 p.15), and Madhva is by no means the last commentator on the Brahma Sūtra either. Important names in the history of Indian theology are amongst the latter day commentators: Nimbārka (13th cent. C.E.), Śrkaṇṭha(15th cent. C.E.), Vallabha (16th cent. C.E.), and Baladeva (18th cent. C.E.). However, the majority of the commentaries prior to Śaṅkara have been lost to history. The philosophical positions expressed in the various commentaries fall into four major camps of Vedānta: Bhedābheda, Advaita, Viśiṣṭādvaita and Dvaita. They principally differ on the metaphysics of individual selves and Brahman, though there are also some striking ethical differences between these schools as well.

i. Bhedābheda

According to the Bhedābheda view, Brahman converts itself into the created, but yet maintains a distinct identity. Thus, the school holds that Brahman is both different (bheda) and not different (abheda) from creation and the individual jīva.

The philosophical persuasion that has produced the most commentaries on the Brahma Sūtra is the Bhedābheda philosophy. Textual evidence suggests that all of the commentaries authored prior to Śaṅkara’s famous Advaita commentary on the Brahma Sūtra subscribed to a form of Bhedābheda, which one historian calls “Pantheistic Realism” (Sharma, pp. 15-7). And on natural readings, it appears that most of the remaining commentators (but for the three famous commentators) also promulgate an interpretation of the Brahma Sūtra that falls within the Bhedābheda camp.

ii. Commonalities of the Three Famous Commentaries

While the three major commentators on the Brahma Sūtra’s differ on important metaphysical questions like the nature and relationship of Brahman to creation and jīvas, or the important moral questions on the priority of Vedic morality, there are some common views that they all share.

All of the three major schools of Vedānta hold that the Vedas are the ultimate source of knowledge of Brahman, and that the Vedas have an independent validity, not reducible or contingent upon the validity of any other means of knowledge (Śaṅkara’s, Rāmānuja’s and Madhva’s Brahma Sūtra Bhāṣyas, I.i.1-3). This interpretation of the Brahma Sūtra pits the Vedānta tradition against the Nyāya optimism about natural theology. For the major schools of Vedānta, natural reason cannot, on its own, arrive at knowledge of the existence of God (Brahman). (For a detailed criticism of the Nyāya natural theology, see Rāmānuja’s Brahma Sūtra Bhāṣya pp. 162-74.)

Rāmānuja and Śaṅkara both regard the individual jīva as being uncreated, and having no beginning (Śaṅkara’s Brahma Sūtra Bhāṣya II.iii.16; Rāmānuja’s Brahma Sūtra Bhāṣya II.iii.18). Madhva concurs that individual souls are eternal, but yet insists that it is correct to regard Brahman as the source of individual souls (Madhva’s Brahma Sūtra Bhāṣya II.iii.19).

The three major commentators on the Brahma Sūtra see eye to eye on the nature of the individual as agent. According to Śaṅkara, Rāmānuja and Madhva, the individual, or jīva, is an agent, with desires and goals. However, in and of itself, it has no power to make its will manifest. Brahman, on all three accounts, steps in and grants the fruits of the desires of an individual. Thus while on this account individuals are agents, they are really also quite impotent. (Śaṅkara’s and Rāmānuja’s Brahma Sūtra Bhāṣyas I.iii.41; Madhva’s Brahma Sūtra Bhāṣya II.iii.42). All three authors are sensitive to the fact that Brahman’s help in bringing about the fruits of desires of individuals implicates Brahman in the evils of the world, and hence opens up the problem of evil. The theodicy of all three relies upon the doctrine of the eternality of the individual jīva. Since there is always some prior choice and action on the part of the individual according to which Brahman has to dispense consequences, at no point can Brahman be accused of partiality, cruelty, or making persons choose the things that they do (Śaṅkara’s and Rāmānuja’s Brahma Sūtra Bhāṣyas II.i.34; Madhva Bhāṣya II.i.35, iii.42).

Finally, Rāmānuja and Śaṅkara both appear to take a position on the propriety of animal sacrifices as prescribed in the Vedas that is reminiscent of the Pūrvamīmāṃsā deferral to the Vedas on all matters of morality. According to both Śaṅkara and Rāmānuja, animal sacrifices cannot be regarded as evils for they are enjoined in the Vedas, and the Vedas is the ultimate authority on such matters (Śaṅkara’s and Rāmānuja’s Brahma Sūtra Bhāṣya III.i.25). Madhva in contrast is reputed to have been a staunch opponent of animal sacrifices, who held that such rituals are a result of a corruption of the Vedic tradition. He interprets the Brahma Sūtra in such a way that the question of animal sacrifices does not arise.

iii. Advaita

Combining the negative particle “a” with the term “dvaita” creates the term “advaita”. The term “dvaita” is often translated as “dualism” as the term “advaita” is often translated as “non-dualism.” In the case of Dvaita Vedānta, this convention of translation is misleading, for Dvaita Vedānta does not, like the Sāṅkhya system, propound a metaphysical dualism. Indeed, Dvaita Vedānta holds an explicitly pluralistic metaphysics. Rather, “dvaita” in the context of Vedānta nomenclature is an ordinal, meaning “secondness.” Dvaita Vedānta, thus, holds that there is such a thing as secondness—something extra, that comes after the first: Brahman. Advaita Vedānta, in contrast, holds that Brahman is one without a second. “Advaita” can thus be translated as “monism,” “non-duality” or most perspicuously as “non-secondness” (Hacker p.131n21).

The principal author in the Advaita tradition is Śaṅkara. In addition to writing several philosophical works, Śaṅkara the commentator on the Brahma Sūtra, set up four monasteries in the four corners of India. Successive heads of the monasteries, according to tradition, take Śaṅkara’s name. This has contributed to great confusion about the views that Śaṅkara, the commentator on the Brahma Sūtras held, for many of his successors also authored philosophical works with the same name. On the basis of comparing writing style, vocabulary, and the colophons of the various works attributed to “Śaṅkara,” the German philologist and scholar of Indian philosophy, Paul Hacker, has concluded that only a portion of the works attributed to Śaṅkara are by the author of the commentary on the Brahma Sūtras (Hacker pp. 41-56). These genuine works include commentaries on the Upaniṣads, and a commentary on the Bhagavad Gītā. The following explication will be restricted to such works.

It is commonly held that Śaṅkara argued that the common sense, empirical world as we know it is an illusion, or māyā. The term “māyā” does not figure prominently in the genuine writings of Śaṅkara. However, it is an accurate assessment that Śaṅkara holds that the majority of our beliefs about the reality of a plurality of objects and persons are ultimately false.

Śaṅkara’s philosophy and criticism of common sense rests on an argument unique to him in the history of Indian philosophy—an argument that Śaṅkara sets at the outset of his commentary on the Brahma Sūtra. From this argument from superimposition, the ordinary human psyche (which self identifies with a body, a unique personal history, and distinguishes itself from a plurality of other persons and objects) comes about by an erroneous superimposition of the characteristics of subjectivity (consciousness, or the sense of being a witness), with the category of objects (which includes the characteristics of having a body, existing at a certain time and place and being numerically distinct from other objects). According to Śaṅkara, these categories are opposed to each other as night and day. And hence, the conflation of the two categories is fallacious. However, it is also a creative mistake. As a result of this superimposition, the jīva (individual person) is constructed complete with psychological integrity, and a natural relationship with a body (Śaṅkara Brahma Sūtra Bhāṣya, Preamble to I.i.1). All of this is brought about by beginningless nescience (avidyā)—a creative factor at play in the creation of the cosmos.

In reality, all there really is on Śaṅkara’s account is Brahman: objects of its awareness, such as the entire universe, exist within the realm of its consciousness. The liberation of the individual jīva occurs when it undoes the error of superimposition, and no longer identifies itself with a body, or a particular person with a natural history, but with Brahman.

It is worth stressing that Śaṅkara’s view is not a form of subjective idealism, or solipsism in any ordinary sense. For those sympathetic to Śaṅkara’s account, superimposition is an objective occurrence that happens most anywhere there is an ordinary organism with a living body. However, Śaṅkara’s system is properly characterized as a form of Absolute Idealism, for on its account only the undifferentiated Absolute is ultimately real, while affairs of the world are its thoughts.

Śaṅkara’s Advaita tradition is known for giving a nuanced, and two-part account of the ‘self’ and ‘Brahman.’ On Śaṅkara’s account, there is a lower and higher self. The lower self is the jīva, while the higher self (the real referent of the personal pronoun “I,” used by anyone) is the one real Self: Ātma, which on Śaṅkara’ s account is Brahman. Likewise, on Śaṅkara’s account, there is a lower and a higher Brahman (Śaṅkara Brahma Sūtra Bhāṣya IV.3.16. pp. 403-4). The lower Brahman is the personal God that pious devotees pray to and meditate on, while the Higher Brahman is devoid of most all such qualities, is impersonal, and is characterized as being essentially bliss (ānanda) (Śaṅkara Brahma Sūtra Bhāṣya III.3.14) truth (satyam) knowledge (jñānam) and infinite (anantam) (cf. Śaṅkara, Taittitrīya Upaniṣad Bhāṣya II.i.1.). The lower Brahman, or the personal God that people pray to, can be afforded the title of “Brahman” owing to its proximity to the Highest Brahman: in the world of plurality, it is the closest thing to the Ultimate (Śaṅkara Brahma Sūtra Bhāṣya IV.3.9). However, it too, like the concept of the individual person, is a result of the error of superimposing the qualities of objectivity and subjectivity on each other (Śaṅkara, Brahma Sūtra Bhāṣya IV.3.10). In the Advaita tradition, the lower Brahman is known as the saguṇa Brahman (or Brahman with qualities) while the highest Brahman is known as the nirguṇa Brahman (or Brahman without qualities) (Śaṅkara Brahma Sūtra Bhāṣya III.2.21).

Śaṅkara takes a skeptical attitude towards the importance of dharma, or morality. On Śaṅkara’s account, so long as one exists as a construction of necessience, operating under the erroneous assumption that one is a distinct object from Brahman and other objects, then one ought to follow the Vedas and its injunctions regarding dharma for it will help form tendencies to look within (Śaṅkara, Bhagavad Gītā Bhāṣya on 18:66). However, for the serious aspirant, Śaṅkara regards dharma as an impediment to liberation—it too must be abandoned, lest an individual reinforce their self-identification with a body in contradistinction to other bodies and persons (Śaṅkara, Bhagavad Gītā Bhāṣya on 4:21). Those sympathetic to Śaṅkara’s philosophy often regard Śaṅkara’s skepticism about dharma as a liberal and progressive aspect to his philosophy, for it devalues the importance of Vedic dharma, which contains within it caste morality. Critics of Śaṅkara are likely to regard Śaṅkara’s skepticism about the importance of dharma as troubling, not because it implies that we should forsake Vedic dharma, but because it suggests that we ought to give up moral concerns, altogether, for the sake of spiritual pursuits (lest we fall back into the fallacy of superimposition).

iv. Viśistādvaita

The term “Viśiṣṭādvaita” is often translated as "Qualified Non-Dualism." An alternative, and more informative, translation is “Non-duality of the qualified whole,” or perhaps ‘Non-duality with qualifications.” The principal exponent of this school of Vedānta is Rāmānuja, who attempted to eschew the illusionist implications of Advaita Vedānta, and the perceived logical problems of the Bhedābheda view while attempting to reconcile the portions of the Upaniṣads that affirmed a substantial monism and those that affirmed substantial pluralism. Rāmānuja’s solution to his problematic is to argue for a theistic and organismic conception of Brahman.

The theism of Rāmānuja’s Viśiṣṭādvaita shows up in his insistence that Brahman is a specific deity (Viṣṇu, also known as “Nārāyana”) who is an abode of an infinite number of auspicious qualities. The organismic aspect of Rāmānuja’s model consists in his view that all things that we normally consider as distinct from Brahman (such as individual persons or jīvas, mundane objects, and other unexalted qualities) constitute the Body of Brahman, while the Ātman spoken of in the Upaniṣads is the non-body, or mental component of Brahman. The result is a metaphysic that regards Brahman as the only substance, but yet affirms the existence of a plurality of abstract and concrete objects as the qualities of Brahman’s Body and Soul (Vedārthasaṅgraha §2).

Rāmānuja holds that in the absence of stains of passed karma the jīva (individual person) resembles Brahman in being of the nature of consciousness and knowledge (Rāmānuja, Brahma Sūtra Bhāṣya, I.i.1. “Great Siddhānta” pp. 99-102). Past actions cloud our true nature and force us to act out their consequences. On Rāmānuja’s account, the prime way of extricating ourselves from the beginningless effects of karma involves bhakti, or devotion to God. But bhakti on its own is not sufficient, or at least, bhakti if it is to bring about liberation must either be combined with the karma yoga mentioned in the Bhagavad Gītā, or it must turn into bhakti yoga. For attending to one’s dharma (duty) is the chief means by which one can propitiate God, on Rāmānuja’s account (Rāmānuja, Gītā Bhāṣya, XVIII.47 p.583). Moreover, in attending to one’s dharma in the deontological spirit characteristic of karma yoga and consonant with bhakti yoga one prevents the development of new karmic dispositions, and can allow the past stores of karma to be naturally extinguished. This will have the effect of unclouding the individual jīva’s omniscience, and bringing the jīva closer to a vision of God, which alone is an unending source of joy (Vedārthasaṅgraha §241). Unlike Śaṅkara, Rāmānuja insists that dharma is never to be abandoned (Rāmānuja, Bhagavad Gītā Bhāṣya XVIII.66, p.599).

v. Dvaita

Madhva is one of the principal theistic exponents of Vedānta. On his account, Brahman is a personal God, and specifically He is the Hindu deity Viṣṇu.

According to Madhva, reality is characterized by a five fold difference: (i) jīvas (individual persons) are different from God; (ii) jīvas are also different from each other; (iii) inanimate objects are different from God; (iv) inanimate objects are different from other inanimate objects; (v) inanimate objects are different from jīvas (Mahābhāratatātparnirnayaḥ, I. 70-71). The number of types of entities on Madhva’s account appears thus to be three: God, jīvas, and inanimate objects. However, the actual number of objects on Madhva’s account appears to be very high. This substantial pluralism sets Madhva apart from the other principle exponents of Vedānta.

A distinctive doctrine of Madhva’s Vedānta is his view that jīvas fall into a hierarchy, with the most exalted jīvas occupying a place below Viṣṇu (such as Viṣṇu’s companions in his eternal abode) to the lowest jīvas, who occupy dark hell regions. Moreover, on Madhva’s account, the ranking of jīvas is eternal, and hence those who occupy the lowest hells are eternally damned. Amongst the middle level jīvas, the Gods and the most virtuous of humans are eligible for liberation. The average amongst the middle rung jīvas transmigrate forever, while the lowest amongst the middle level jīvas find themselves in the upper hells (Mahābhāratatātparnirnayaḥ I.85-88).

Madhva holds that liberation comes to those who appreciate the five fold differences and the hierarchy of the jīvas (Mahābhāratatātparnirnayaḥ, 81-2). However, ultimately, whether one is liberated or not is completely at the discretion of Brahman, and Brahman is pleased by nothing more than bhakti, or devotion (Mahābhāratatātparnirnayaḥ I.117).

g. Classical Hindu Philosophy in the Context of Indian Philosophy

Hindu philosophy did not develop in a vacuum. Rather, it is an inextricable part of the history of Indian philosophy. Hence, other Indian philosophical movements did not only influence Hindu philosophy, but it also arguably had an influence on their development as well.

The most salient manner in which Hindu philosophy was influenced by other Indian philosophical developments is in the realm of ethics. In its infancy, Hindu philosophy as set out in the action portion of the Vedas was wedded to the practice of animal sacrifices (see Aitareya Brāhmana, book II.1-2). Buddhism and Jainism were both critical of the practice. Buddhism as a philosophy devoted to the alleviation of suffering is disposed to see animal sacrifices as involving unnecessary suffering. Jainism, in contrast, had made Ahiṃsā, or non-harmfulness, its chief moral virtue. Jainism might very well have been the first religio-philosophical movement in India staunchly wedded to vegetarianism. And while vegetarianism was alien to early Hindu practice, it has become an integral part of Hindu orthodoxy in many parts of India. Now, for many Hindus, the very idea of eating meat is the very archetype of immoral and irreligious behavior. This attitude can be found amongst the most orthodox followers of both Śaṅkara and Rāmānuja, who, as noted, defended the propriety of animal sacrifices. The shift in the general attitude of many Hindus arguably goes to the credit of Jainism, a once prevalent religion in India, which has been a source of tireless criticism of violence.

A case might also be made for the influence of Jainism on the Yoga darśana. Specifically, the yama rules found in the Yoga darśana, which include Ahiṃsā, are identical to the five Great vows of Jainism (Ācāraṅga Sūtra II.15.i.1–v.1). While it is possible that these precepts have a third common source, or that they are indigenous to the Yoga tradition, it is also highly probable that they were incorporated, early on, into the Yoga tradition by way of influence of Jain thought. The Yoga tradition also shows the mark of being influenced by Mahāyāna Buddhism in its account of “dharmameghasamādhi”—a term that shows up in many latter day Buddhist texts (see Klostermaier).

In the realm of metaphysics, a controversial argument can be made that Hindu philosophy, as found in the Upaniṣads, has exercised a profound effect on the development of latter day Indian Buddhist thought. Increasingly, in the context of latter Indian Buddhism, there is a movement away from a seeming agnosticism to an affirmation of the Ultimate in terms of a master concept, which designates both the grounding and the source of all. For Buddhist Idealism (Yogācāra, or Vijñānavāda) the master concept is that of Consciousness-Only, and in the context of Mādhyamika Buddhism of Nāgārjuna (2nd cent. C.E.) the master concept is that of Emptiness, or Śūnyatā. Such a move towards a master concept resembles the Upaniṣad’s employment of the concept "Brahman" and is arguably an adaptation of some elements of the metaphysical picture of the Upaniṣads into Buddhist philosophy.

Similarly, a case might also be made that the notion of “Two-Truths” (the doctrine that there is a distinction to be drawn between conventional truth that operates in ordinary, domestic discourse that recognizes diversity, and Truth from the perspective of the Ultimate which rejects diversity) operative in latter Buddhist thought is also a doctrine that can be found in the Upaniṣads (cf. Muṇdaka Upaniṣad, I.i. 5-6). While this doctrine gets its clearest explication in the context of latter day Buddhist thought in India, it seems that it has its precursor in Vedic speculation.

4. Stage Three: Neo-Hinduism

The term “Neo-Hinduism” refers to a conception of the Hindu religion formed by recent authors who were learned in traditional Indian philosophy, and English. Famous Neo-Hindus include Swami Vivekānanda (1863-1902) the famous disciple of the traditional Hindu saint Rāma-Kṛṣṇa, and India’s first president, Sarvepalli Radhakrishnan (1888-1975) a professional philosopher who held academic posts at various universities in India and Oxford, in the UK.

A famous formulation of the doctrine of Neo-Hinduism is the simile that likens religions to rivers, and the oceans to God: as all rivers lead to the ocean so do all religions lead to God. Similarly, Swami Nirvenananda in his book Hinduism at a Glance writes:

All true religions of the world lead us alike to the same goal, namely, to perfection if, of course, they are followed faithfully. Each of them is a correct path to Divinity. The Hindus have been taught to regard religion in this light. (Nivernananda, p.20.)

Frequently, Neo-Hindu authors identify Hinduism with Vedānta in their elaboration of Neo-Hindu doctrine, and in this formulation we find another tenet of Neo-Hinduism: Hinduism is not simply another religion, but a meta-religion, or the philosophy of religion. Hence, we find Vivekānanda writes:

Ours is the universal religion. It is inclusive enough, it is broad enough to include all the ideals. All the ideals of religion that already exist in the world can be immediately included, and we can patiently wait for all the ideals that are to come in the future to be taken in the same fashion, embraced in the infinite arms of the religion of Vedānta. (Vivekānanda, vol. III p.251-2.)

Similarly, Radhakrishnan holds “[t]he Vedānta is not a religion, but religion itself in its most universal and deepest significance” (Radhakrishnan, 35).

The view identified as Neo-Hinduism here might be understood as a form of Universalism or liberal theology that attempts to ground religion itself in Hindu philosophy. Neo-Hinduism must be distinguished from another theological view that has a long history in India, which we might call Inclusivist Theology. According to Inclusivist Theology, there are elements in any number of religious practices that are consonant with the one true religion, and if a practitioner of a contrary religion holds fast to those elements in their religion that are correct, they will eventually attain the Ultimate. Often, this view finds expression in the widespread Hindu view that all the various deities are really lower manifestations of one true deity (for example, a Vaiṣṇava who held an Inclusivist theology might interpret all deities, in so far as they are consonant with the qualities attributed to Viṣṇu, to be lower manifestations of Viṣṇu, and thus good first steps to conceptualizing the Ultimate). Neo-Hinduism, in contrast, makes no distinction between deities, religions, or elements within religions, for all religions operate at the level of the practical, while the Ultimate, ex hypothesi, is transcendent. There is no religion, or no portion of any religion, which is incorrect, on this view, for all are equally human efforts to strive for the Divine. Neo-Hindus do not typically regard themselves as forming a new philosophy or religion, though the doctrine expressed by Neo-Hinduism is characterized by theses and concerns not clearly expressed in classical Hindu philosophy. As a rule, Neo-Hinduism is a reformulation of Advaita Vedānta, which emphasizes the implicit liberal theological tendencies that follow from the two-fold account of Brahman.

Recall that on Śaṅkara’s account a distinction is to be drawn between a lower and higher Brahman. Higher Brahman (nirguṇa Brahman) is impersonal and lacks much of what is normally attributed to God. In contrast, lower Brahman (saguṇa Brahman) has personal characteristics attributed to deities. While the higher Brahman is the eternally existing reality, lower Brahman is a result of the same creative error that results in the construction of normal integrated egos in bodies: superimposition. Neo-Hinduism takes note of the fact that this account of lower Brahman’s nature implies that the deities normally worshiped in a religious context are really natural artefacts, or projections of aesthetic concerns on the Ultimate: they are images of the Ultimate formulated for the sake of religious progress. Neo-Hinduism thus reasons that no one’s personal God is any more the real God than another religion’s personal God: rather, all are equally approximations of the one real, impersonal Brahman that transcends the domestic qualities attributed to it. While personal deities are considerably devalued on this account, the result is a liberal theology that is closed to no religious tradition, in principle, for any religion that personalizes God will be approaching the highest Brahman through the lens of superimposed characteristics of object-qualities on Brahman.

Critics of Neo-Hinduism have noted that while Neo-Hinduism aspires to shun the sectarianism that characterises the history of religion in the West through a spirit of Universalism, Neo-Hinduism itself engages in a sectarianism, in so far as it identifies Hinduism with the true perspective that understands the quality-less nature of the Ultimate (cf. Halbfass, Tradition and Reflection pp. 51-86). In defense of Neo-Hinduism, it could be argued that it is a genuine, modern attempt to re-understand the philosophical implications of earlier Hindu thought, and not an attempt to reconcile the various religions of the world.

Critics might also argue that Neo-Hinduism is bad history: many philosophers that we today regard as Hindu (such as Rāmānuja or Madhva) would not accept the idea that all deities are equal, and that God is ultimately an impersonal entity. Moreover, Śaṅkara, the commentator on the Brahma Sūtras did not argue for the type of Universalism characteristic of Neo-Hinduism, which regards all religious observance as equally valid (though this arguably is an implication of his philosophy). Neo-Hinduism, the critic might argue, is historical revisionism. In response, Neo-Hinduism might defend itself by insisting that it is not in the business of providing an account of the history of all of Hindu philosophy, but only a certain strand that it regards as the most important.

5. Conclusion: the Status of Hindu Philosophy

Hindu philosophers have taken varied views on many important issues in philosophy. Hindu philosophers, for instance, are not in agreement as to whether God is a person. They have not all agreed upon the nature and scope of the epistemic validity of the Vedas, nor have they all agreed on basic questions of axiology, such as the content of morality. Some affirm the importance of Vedicly prescribed acts, such as animal sacrifices, while others, such as the Yoga philosopher Patañjali, appear to suggest that violence is always to be avoided. Likewise, some Hindu philosophers hold that the content of the Vedas as always binding, such as Rāmānuja. Others, such as Śaṅkara, regard it as constituting provisional obligations, subject to a person not being serious about liberation. All Hindu philosophers are not in agreement on whether there is anything like liberation. Most recognize the existence of liberation, while the early Pūrvamīmāṃsā does not. While all Hindu philosophers hold that there is something like an individual self, they differ radically in their account of the reality and nature of this individual. This difference in ontology reflects the rich metaphysical diversity amongst Hindu philosophers: some affirm the existence of a plurality of objects; qualities and relations (such as the Vaiśeṣika, Dvaita Vedānta) while others do not (Advaita Vedānta). Such differences have made Hindu philosophy into a sub-tradition of philosophy within Indian philosophy, and not simply one comprehensive philosophical view amongst many. Hindu philosophy is not a static doctrine, but a growing tradition rich in diverse philosophical perspectives. Contrary to some popular accounts, what is presented as Hindu philosophy in recent times is not simply an elaboration of ancient tradition, but a re-evaluation and dialectical evolution of Hindu philosophical thought. Far from detracting from the authority or authenticity of recent Hindu speculation, what this shows is that Hindu philosophy is a living and vibrant tradition that shows no sign of being fossilized into a curiosity from the past, any time soon.

6. References and Further Readings

a. Primary Sources

  • Ācāraṅga Sūtra. Trans. Harmann Georg Jacobi. Jaina Sūtras. Ed. Harmann Georg Jacobi. Vol. 1. 2 vols. Delhi: AVF Books, 1987.
  • Aiterya Brāhmana. Aiterya Brāhmana of the Ṛg Veda. Trans. Martin Haug. Sacred Books of the Hindus. Ed. B.D. Basu. Allahabad: Sudhindra Nath Vasu, 1922.
  • Bhāgavata Purāṇa. Śrīmad Bhāgavatam. Trans. Tapasyānanda. Madras: Sri Ramakrishna Math, 1981.
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Author Information

Shyam Ranganathan
York University

Gottlob Frege: Language

FregeGottlob Frege (1848-1925) is most celebrated today for his contributions to mathematical logic and the philosophy of language. The first section below considers why a philosophical investigation of language mattered at all for Frege, the mathematician, and why it should have mattered to him.  At the same time, the considerations may serve to illustrate some general motivations that were behind the development of philosophy of language as a separate branch of philosophy in the 20th century. Section 2 deals with Frege's idea of a formal language and the motivations for developing and employing such a language for purposes of logico-philosophical analysis. The shift from Frege's early semantics to his famous distinction between sense and significance is explained in Section 3, as are the motivations for this shift. The section also contains a discussion of the difficulties that scholars have encountered when trying to find a proper English translation of Frege's key semantic terms. Michael Dummett's claim that Frege had brought the modern tradition to an end by replacing epistemology with the theory of meaning as the foundation of philosophy in general has been an influential interpretation, but has increasingly been challenged in the past decades.  The present article emphasizes that  Frege's philosophy of language should be regarded as a branch of epistemology, even if Frege himself did not fully engage in epistemology in the narrower sense of the term.

Table of Contents

  1. Language and Thought
    1. Communication
    2. Language and Memory
    3. Rationalism, Platonism, and Empiricism about Thoughts
  2. The Formal Language Approach
    1. The Concept Script
    2. The Logical Imperfections of Ordinary Language
      1. Non-Observance of the Difference Between Concept and Object
      2. Empty Proper Names
      3. The Vagueness of Predicates
      4. Grammatical versus Logical Categories
      5. The Intermingling of Subjective and Objective Aspects of Meaning
  3. From Conceptual Contents to Sinn and Bedeutung: The Development of Frege's Semantics
    1. The Monism of Frege's Early Semantics
    2. Sense and Significance
    3. Some Issues of Translation
    4. The Context Principle and the Priority of Judgments over Concepts
  4. References and Further Reading
    1. Frege's Writings
    2. Other Recommended Literature
      1. General Introductions and Companions to Frege's Work
      2. General Introductions to the Philosophy of Language
      3. On (Various Aspects of) Frege’s Philosophy of Language
      4. Other Philosophy of Language Relevant to or Referenced in this Article
      5. Some Specialized Literature on the Epistemological Dimensions of Frege’s Thought
      6. General Contributions and Companions to the History of Early Analytic Philosophy
      7. Literature on Other Aspects of Frege’s Philosophy
      8. Other Literature Referenced in this Article
    3. Related Entries

1. Language and Thought

Long before Frege, it was considered commonplace that language is a necessary vehicle for human thought. In the modern period, Thomas Hobbes and John Locke had assigned two main characteristic uses to language with regard to thought: First, it is used to assist memory, or the representation and recording of one's own thoughts; and second, it is used as a required vehicle of communication of one's own thoughts to other people (Hobbes 1655:192-97; Locke 1690, Bk. III, §1). It was not before the later decades of the 19th century, however, that philosophical method was finally beginning to take a radically "linguistic turn" – investigating language in order to best deal with ontological or conceptual problems – and Frege has been regarded as one of the first and the most innovative thinkers in this respect.

For Frege, too, it was the very insight that human thought depends in certain ways on language, or on symbols in general, that compelled him to analyze the workings of language in order to investigate the logical structure of thought. Indeed, it seems that language itself was never the primary object of his philosophical interest. Rather, most of the general philosophical issues upon which Frege reflected, aside from his more specialized projects in the philosophy of mathematics, had to do with the nature of thought in general and its relation to logic, to truth, to language, and to the objects it can be about. In 1918, Frege published a lengthy essay titled "Thoughts," in which he describes his motives for investigating the nature of language:

I am not here in the happy position of a mineralogist who shows his audience a rock-crystal: I cannot put a thought in the hands of my readers with the request that they should examine it from all sides. Something in itself not perceptible by sense, the thought is presented to the reader – and I must be content with that – wrapped up in a perceptible linguistic form. The pictorial aspect of language presents difficulties. The sensible always breaks in and makes expressions pictorial and so improper. So one fights against language, and I am compelled to occupy myself with language although it is not my proper concern here. I hope I have succeeded in making clear to my readers what I want to call 'thought' (1997:333f., n.).

Frege presents us with a dilemma that lies at the heart of his lifelong attitude toward language. On the one hand, language is indispensable for us in order to get access to thought. On the other hand, language – because of its sensible character – obscures thought (which by itself is insensible). Thus, Frege saw himself forced to deal with language by way of a continuous struggle – fighting the distortions that are imposed on thought by language, and diagnosing as well as clarifying the misunderstandings that result from these distortions.

But why is language indispensable for thought, and why did Frege think that it is? These two questions are central for an understanding of the rise of philosophy of language in general, and of Frege's engagement in philosophy of language in particular. They are important because, if it turns out that we cannot find a convincing reason for the indispensability of language for thought, then the struggle with language that Frege is talking about above would not seem necessary for philosophical inquiry: we could just circumvent the obstacle of language and access our concepts and thoughts directly. Historically, dealing with the second question in particular might give us some insight about the extent of Frege's possible indebtedness, or lack thereof, to earlier conceptions of the relations between language and thought and language as such.

Thus, it would be worthwhile taking a closer look at the two traditional functions of language with regard to thought that Hobbes and Locke distinguished in the context of their respective epistemological reflections. These were: (a) the indispensable assistance of language to memory, or to the representation and recording of one's own thoughts, and (b) its role as a necessary vehicle of the communication of one's own thoughts to other people.

a. Communication

If we take a closer look at those two characteristic functions of language as traditionally distinguished we find that they seem to be intimately connected. For one thing, if we conceive of human communication as essentially intentional – as has been the standard view probably throughout the history of philosophy, and most prominently advocated in the 20th century by Paul Grice – then we must ask just how we could even intend to convey a certain piece of information to someone else if we are not able to represent this information to ourselves in conscious thought. Our communicative intention would be quite void – there would be a missing element in the three-place relation "X intends to convey Y to Z". Even less, it seems, could intentional communication ever succeed if the speaker is not herself aware of what she intends to communicate – unless, perhaps, we also acknowledge the existence of subconscious communicational intentions. But even in this case, it could be argued, the speaker presumably would need to be able to have a representation of what she subconsciously intends to convey in order to do so, and if such a representation is only to be had through language then even the kind of communication that rests on subconscious intentions could not take place without language.

To be sure, information may in principle be conveyed even without the conveyor's intention, and perhaps it is merely a matter of terminology whether or not we acknowledge that there is also something like unintentional human communication: slips of the tongue, a blushful face, or mere movements of a face muscle, can only too well convey information about the thoughts or attitudes of the conveyor, and even indirectly about what these thoughts and attitudes are about.  However, even if we include such phenomena in the category of "human communication", it still appears that language is required for communication precisely insofar as it is required for the representation and recording of one's own thoughts.  For, in such a case, the very act of understanding the piece of information conveyed requires the person to whom it is conveyed to be able to record it for herself in her own memory; and, inasmuch as this requires language, human communication always requires language at least on he side of the receiver of the information - even if communication is to be understood as not presupposing communicational intentions. On this account, language appears as a necessary vehicle of human communication precisely because it is a necessary vehicle to record one's own thoughts. Thus, communication of one's own thoughts to another appears to be entirely dependent on representing and recording one's own thoughts to herself.

b. Language and Memory

Why should language be a necessary vehicle to record one's own thoughts? And what does this exactly mean? Does it mean that language constitutes thought, so that the latter could not be without the former? Or does it merely mean that we could not become aware of our thoughts or could not grasp them without language?

Let us look at what Frege thought about this matter. His earliest and at the same time most comprehensive attempt to answer the first question above is in his 1882 piece "On the Scientific Justification of a Begriffsschrift". The relevant passages are cited at full length:

Our attention is directed by nature to the outside. The vivacity of sense-impressions surpasses that of memory-images to such an extent that, at first, sense-impressions determine almost by themselves the course of our ideas, as is the case in animals. And we would scarcely ever be able to escape this dependency if the outer world were not to some degree dependent on us.

Even most animals, through their ability to move about, have an influence on their sense-impressions: They can flee some, seek others. And they can even effect changes in things. Now humans have this ability to a much greater degree; but nevertheless, the course of our ideas would still not gain its full freedom from this ability alone: It would still be limited to that which our hand can fashion, our voice intone, without the great invention of symbols, which call to mind that which is absent, invisible, perhaps even beyond the senses.

I do not deny that even without symbols the perception of a thing can gather about itself a group of memory-images; but we could not pursue these further: A new perception would let these images sink into darkness and allow others to emerge. But if we produce the symbol of an idea that a perception has called to mind, we create in this way a firm, new focus about which ideas gather. We then select another idea from these in order to elicit its symbol. Thus we penetrate step by step into the inner world of our ideas and move about there at will, using the realm of sensibles itself to free ourselves from its constraint. Symbols have the same importance for thought that discovering how to use the wind to sail against the wind had for navigation....

Also, without symbols we would scarcely lift ourselves to conceptual thinking. Thus in applying the same symbol to different but similar things, we actually no longer symbolize the individual thing, but rather what the similarities have in common: the concept. This concept is first gained by symbolizing it; for since it is, in itself, imperceptible, it requires a perceptible representative in order to appear to  us" (1972:83f. Note, Frege's expression "men" has been changed to "humans").

Frege appears to locate the source of the dependence of human thought on language in the power that sensation exerts on our attention. Based on this he specifies three main characteristic domains of thought for which we need symbols. First, without symbols we could not become aware of things that are physically absent or insensible. Without them we could only become aware of our immediate sensations and some fleeting memory images of these sensations. This view, however – that we could not grasp or become aware of thoughts about invisible things – does not by itself imply that the thoughts themselves could not be without language.

The second domain concerns memory in general. Though according to Frege, the mere perception of a physical object can serve as a focus around which memory images gather even without the help of symbols, these would not be stable and lasting, for new perceptual images would soon take their place. Immediate sensations are usually so much stronger than memory images that without the help of a tool by means of which we could regulate the train and content of our thought independently of sensation it would be almost entirely determined by immediate sensory input. Thus, what Frege seems to have in mind here is that only by using symbols do we enable ourselves to memorize ideas in such a way that we can henceforth call them up more or less at will. In this way, symbols – though themselves sensible – are able, to a large extent, to free us from our dependence on the sensible world. Again, this argument leads only to the conclusion that we could not freely call up past thoughts about the world – it does not show that these thoughts could not exist in the first place without language.

In any case, why should the memory of symbols be less subject to the overwhelming influence of immediate sensations than the fleeting memory images caused by perception without the help of symbols? Perhaps a later passage in the same paper gives us a clue about how it seemed possible to Frege that due to its very nature language could give us power over the immediate impact of sensation and thus enable us to memorize our thoughts:

It is impossible, someone might say, to advance science with a conceptual notation, for the invention of the latter already presupposes the completion of the former. Exactly the same apparent difficulty arises for [ordinary] language. This is supposed to have made reason possible, but how could humans have invented language without reason? Research into the laws of nature employs physical instruments; but these can be produced only by means of an advanced technology, which again is based upon knowledge of the laws of nature. The circle is resolved in each case in the same way: An advance in physics results in an advance in technology, and this makes possible the construction of new instruments by means of which physics is advanced. The application to our case is obvious (1972:89).

Here, Frege draws an analogy between language and reason on the one hand, and technology and science on the other. In both cases, each of the two elements in the respective pairs is needed in order to advance the other. Thus, language is needed to develop and/or employ our faculty of reasoning, on the one hand, but at the same time reason has to be presupposed to a certain degree in order for language to be possible. Hence, for Frege there is something which is the condition of possibility of language, even though that something –which he calls reason – may not fully function or be applicable without language as its tool. This suggests that for Frege reason is also what enables us to overcome the power of immediate sensual input by using language as a tool; it enables us to memorize links between symbols and what they symbolize even despite the continuous influx of fleeting sensations and memory images. In effect, Frege appears to propose a non-vicious circle between reason and language such that, roughly, the former enables us – by its very nature – to hold in memory a small initial assortment of symbols, and such that the use of these symbols then expands our rational capacities to allow for the combinations and application of those symbols, which in turn are stored in the memory to lead to further combinations – as well as the possible invention of new symbols or symbolic systems – whose use leads to further mental expansion, etc. This conception seems to rule out that language could be the product of mere sensation, at least if sensation is not to be conceived of as part of reason or as its basis.

Frege's third explanation for why we need language in order to think is that without the help of symbols we could never raise ourselves to the level of specifically conceptual thinking. For, according to Frege in the passage above, we acquire concepts only by applying the same symbol to different but similar things, thereby no longer symbolizing the individual things, but rather what they have in common: the concept.  Again, this argument does not show that concepts could not exist without language or symbols; rather, it shows that concepts could not become available to us without language. In Frege's own terms, it shows that we could not represent to ourselves what a group of similar things have in common, which is what he calls a concept.

c. Rationalism, Platonism, and Empiricism about Thoughts

Scholars point out that aspects of Frege's 1882 explanation of why we need language in order to think suggest an empiricist, psychologist account (at least of thought content) according to which thought content derives simply from sense impressions via memory images; however, this stands in contrast at least to Frege's later views on the matter (for example, Sluga 2002:82). Indeed, Frege's above admission that at the most basic level sense perception and memory are possible without prior possession of non-sensual conceptual elements seems to stand in direct contrast to rationalist as well as Kantian accounts of the nature of perception. Though, as we saw in the previous section, none of Frege's arguments for the dependency of thought on language explicitly commit him to the view that the very existence of concepts or thought contents depend on language, the idea that at least basic thoughts and memories are possible on the basis of sensation alone raises the question of why then not all thought and memory content may derive – by means of language – from sensual images (which clearly would be an empiricist view).

If this assessment of Frege's 1882 view of content is correct, then it might also be relevant to our evaluation of the above argument as an attempt at explaining why language is necessary for thought. For if, by contrast, we assume that the human mind is furnished with innate ideas in addition to the faculty of sensation – as had been the standard view in modern Continental Rationalism – then it might need some more argumentation to show why concepts become available to us only through the application of general symbols to things that we perceive through the senses, or why we could think of invisible, insensible things only by creating symbols for them. After all, innate ideas – if they exist – are in a certain sense continually present in the mind, if not in our consciousness, and this very presence could perhaps already explain why we are able to memorize perceptual experiences, to engage in conceptual thinking, and in general to overcome the continuous impact of sensation on our attention. In other words, if our minds were already furnished with innate ideas then it would need further explanation to understand why reason could not have a direct impact on human consciousness, that is, why it needs language in addition in order to guide and develop our capacity of thinking. If we assume, however, that thought contents are by their very nature entirely made up of sensations and images gained through sensation, then it would seem much more obvious that without the acquisition of general symbols to represent concepts – instead of the individual, elusive images delivered by sensation – there would be no way for us to make use of and memorize them.

Thus, if Frege held a rationalist view of thought contents at this early point, his argument above for the indispensability of thought for language would still appear somewhat incomplete, and if he was an empiricist about thought content at the time but changed his view later, he should have been expected to supplement his argument at that later time in order to convince us of the necessity to study language in order to explore concepts and thoughts. So let us take a closer look both at Frege's views of the nature of thought content and at plausible rationalist motivations for the philosophical study of language based on the idea that language is necessary for human thought.

Let us first get back to Frege's apparent view – in his 1882 piece – that basic forms of sense perception and memory are possible without prior possession of non-sensual thought contents. This view appears to contradict his own later remarks on perception in, for instance, 1918's "Thought". There he emphasizes that:

Sense impressions alone do not reveal the external world to us. Perhaps there is a being that has only sense impressions without seeing or touching things....Having visual impressions is certainly necessary for seeing things, but not sufficient. What must still be added is not anything sensible. And yet this is just what opens up the external world for us; for without this non-sensible something everyone would remain shut up in his inner world. So perhaps, since the decisive factor lies in the non-sensible, something non-sensible, even without the cooperation of sense impressions, could also lead us out of the inner world and enable us to grasp thoughts (1997: 342f.).

For Frege, forming a thought about the external world -- even the kind of thought involved in the mere perception of an object -- requires more than sense impressions that are available to the human mind. In addition, something non-sensible has to be assumed in order to account for the possibility of perception. The aim of "Thought" was to show that this something is the thought itself -- an entity that, as Frege argues here, belongs neither to the inner world of subjective ideas nor to the world of spatio-temporal, perceivable objects, but rather to a third realm of objective but non-physical things. Indeed, as we read in an earlier passage of the piece, "although the thought does not belong with the contents of the thinker's consciousness, there must be something in his consciousness that is aimed at the thought. But this should not be confused with the thought itself" (ibid.: 342).  In this last passage, Frege clearly distinguishes between a conscious act of thinking – which must be in a certain way "aimed at" an abstract, objective thought – and the thought itself at which it is aimed.

In addition, Frege explicitly rejects the idea that sense impressions alone could enable our minds to grasp such an objective, non-sensible thought -- rather, what is required is again something "non-sensible." This idea obviously fits in with what he said in his 1882 piece about the relation between language and reason. For according to that remark, language – as a means for grasping thoughts – presupposes reason at least as an independent potential. Reason, then, is a likely candidate for the "something non-sensible" that may be required, according to Frege in 1918, "to lead us out of the inner world and enable us to grasp thoughts."  Since language itself consists of and works through the perception and use of sensible symbols, it could not be language that Frege has in mind here. However, Frege does not make use of the term "reason" in his 1918 piece but speaks more concretely of a "special mental capacity, the power of thinking", which is supposed to explain our ability to grasp a thought (ibid.: 341).

In any case, these remarks provide clear evidence that Frege in 1918 conceived of thoughts as existing independently of both physical and empirically psychological reality – thereby ruling out an empiricist account of their constitution. They do not provide conclusive evidence that Frege endorsed a rationalist or transcendentalist view of the origin or nature of conceptual entities, if by this we understand a view according to which either a special faculty of reason – or pure understanding – or alternatively a certain normative value or principle that is constitutive of rationality in general serve to provide the conceptual content of our thought episodes. Rather, Frege's 1918 remarks would just as well be compatible with a naive Platonist view about thought contents, according to which their objective existence is a brute fact, that is, not accountable or explainable in terms of anything else. (This still seems to be one of the most dominant readings of the nature of Fregean thoughts, as well as concepts and numbers; see Baker and Hacker 1984, Dummett 1991, Burge 1992, & al.)

It seems obvious, however, that Frege favored a broadly rationalist or transcendentalist account of the origin of conceptual entities both in his first monograph Conceptual Notation (1879) and in his second, The Foundations of Arithmetic (1884). For in §23 of Conceptual Notation, Frege claims to have shown "how pure thought, regardless of any content given through the senses or even given a priori through an intuition, is able, all by itself, to produce from the content which arises from its own nature judgments that at first glance seem to be possible only on the grounds of some intuition." What Frege has in mind here by "the content that arises from its [pure thought's] own nature" obviously is the content of the laws of logic, which he also calls the "laws of thought" in his preface to Conceptual Notation. Those judgments, by contrast, which "at first glance seem to be possible only on the grounds of some intuition" presumably are those of arithmetic, which Kant had believed to be grounded on the pure intuition of time. This 1879 metaphor of pure thought as grounding arithmetical judgments by way of "the content that arises from its own nature" not only appears inconsistent with Frege's 1882 seeming slip into psychologism about mental content, but at the same time suggests a rationalist or transcendental approach to the nature of at least some of the contents of our judgments. This is so if we conceive of "pure thought" as referring to a capacity or principle that is constitutive of the rational mind, which is how this expression, and similar ones, had been used by Leibniz, Kant, and their successors.

Indeed, in Foundations Frege explicitly sympathizes with Leibniz's view that "the whole of arithmetic is innate and is in virtual fashion in us;" a view according to which even what is innate may need to be learned in order for us to become consciously aware of it (1953, §11). In other passages of Foundations, Frege presents objectivity itself as being constituted by reason, and numbers as its nearest kin:

I understand objective to mean what is independent of our sensations, intuition and imagination, and of all construction of mental pictures out of memories of earlier sensations, but not what is independent of the reason, - for what are things independent of the reason? To answer that would be as much as to judge without judging, or to wash the fur without wetting it (1953, §26).

[O]bjectivity cannot, of course be based on any sense-impression, which as an affection of our mind is entirely subjective, but only, so far as I can see, on the reason (ibid., §27).

On this view of numbers the charm of work on arithmetic and analysis is, it seems to me, easily accounted for. We might say, indeed, almost in the well-known words: The reason's proper study is itself. In arithmetic we are not concerned with objects which we come to know as something alien from without through the medium of the senses, but with objects given directly to our reason and, as its nearest kin, utterly transparent to it. And yet, or rather for that very reason, these objects are not subjective fantasies. There is nothing more objective than the laws of  arithmetic" (ibid., §105).

The first passage above, in particular, recalls Kant´s idea that objectivity is not a feature of things-in-themselves, but of things as they are constituted and apprehended by means of logical forms of judgment, pure categories of understanding and pure forms of intuition. These latter constitute part of the transcendental as opposed to the subjective, psychological aspect of the mind according to Kant. Scholars who tend to read Frege from the perspective of Neo-Kantianism have therefore taken passages like those above as strong evidence for the thesis that his notion of objectivity was not dogmatically metaphysical but epistemological in the tradition of transcendental philosophy (cf. Sluga 1980:120).

In any case, it seems that under the presupposition of either a naive Platonist or a rationalist/transcendentalist account of the origins of objective thought contents, the strength of Frege's 1882 argument for the indispensability of symbols for human thought rests largely on assumptions about the causal influence of sensation on our train of thought. Indeed, as we saw, Frege had initiated this argument with observations about the effect of sense-impressions on our attention. In this he simply followed Leibniz, who – although a rationalist about the origin of thought – had granted that the senses are required to make the mind attentive to truths and to direct it towards some truths rather than others. For this reason, according to Leibniz, even though intellectual ideas and the truths arising from them do not "originate in the senses", without the senses we would never think of them (ibid., I, i, §§5, 11). Similarly, Kant points out in the Critique of Pure Reason that our empirical consciousness must be prompted by sensation or sensible impressions in order to have a beginning in time; hence "all our cognitions commence with experience" (1781/86:B1). Frege obviously agrees with Kant and Leibniz on this point, as he regards sense impressions as necessary – if not sufficient – for perception insofar as they "occasion our judgments" (1924/5, 1979:267; see also Frege's preface to Conceptual Notation, 1972:103). Indeed, with regard to the causality of consciousness we would be "as stupid as rocks" without sense impressions, "and should know nothing either of numbers or of anything else" (1953, §105, n.).

Given such presuppositions about the causal role sensation plays in the generation of actual processes of conscious thought, Frege can still make his case for the necessity of language for thinking by arguing as follows: Without sensible symbols, which – due to their intimate connection to reason (perhaps in the form of a set of innate ideas) – are able to draw our attention away from other sensory input and toward conceptual thought, our entire mental life would be largely dictated by the nature of our immediate sensations. Therefore, we would be psychologically unable to rise to higher forms of conscious awareness and contemplation than those provided by immediate sense perception and the fleeting memory images arising from it. This way of arguing would not commit him to the view that concepts or conceptual thought contents themselves depend for their existence on symbols or on any other sensible images. Rather, the dependence of human thought on language could itself be thought of as merely causal (Baker and Hacker 1984:65f.). As we saw before, Frege apparently sympathized with Leibniz's view that what is innate may need to be learned in order for us to become consciously aware of it. But if we need to learn about truths and concepts that have been in our understanding all along – as Leibniz saw it – then this is compatible with the claim that in order to learn them we need to use language.

Indeed, in a much later piece written and submitted for publication shortly before his death ("Sources of Knowledge of Mathematics and the Mathematical Natural Sciences"), Frege finally comes to explicitly commit himself to the view that language is necessary not for the existence of thought contents themselves, but only for our conscious awareness of them, that is, for our acts of thinking. In this context, he speaks of a "logical source of knowledge" and a "logical disposition" in us that must be at work in the formation of language, where he made use in 1882 of the ambiguous word "reason" and in 1918 of the expression "power of thinking" to denote a special mental capacity:

The senses present us with something external and because of this it is easier to comprehend how mistakes can occur than it is in the case of the logical source of knowledge which is wholly inside us and thus appears to be more proof against contamination. But appearances are deceptive. For our thinking is closely bound up with language and thereby with the world of the senses. Perhaps our thinking is at first a form of speaking which then becomes an imaging of speech. Silent thinking would in that case be speech that has become noiseless, taking place in the imagination. Now we may of course also think in mathematical signs; yet even then thinking is tied up with what is perceptible to the senses. To be sure, we distinguish the sentence as the expression of a thought from the thought itself. We know we can have various expressions for the same thought. The connection of a thought with one particular sentence is not a necessary one; but that a thought of which we are conscious is connected in our mind with some sentence or other is for us humans necessary.

But that does not lie in the nature of the thought but in our own nature. There is no contradiction in supposing there to exist beings that can grasp the same thought as we do without needing to clad it in a form that can be perceived by the senses. But still, for us humans there is this necessity. Language is a human creation; and so humans had, it would appear, the capacity to shape it in conformity with the logical disposition alive in them. Certainly the logical disposition of humans was at work in the formation of language but equally alongside this many other dispositions – such as the poetic disposition. And so language is not constructed from a logical "blueprint" (1979:269).

Here, Frege explains how it comes about that language in a certain sense "contaminates" the logical source of knowledge – that is, the faculty in us that enables us to have knowledge about logical structures and relations. As he sees it here, this logical disposition in us is not identical to the ability to speak a language, although it is required for the development and acquisition of a language. As he points out in a later passage,

If we disregard how thinking occurs in the consciousness of an individual, and attend instead to the true nature of thinking, we shall not be able to equate it with speaking. In that case we shall not derive thinking from speaking; thinking will then emerge as that which has priority and we shall not be able to blame thinking for the logical defects we have noted in language" (ibid.: 270).

Accordingly, thoughts are not to be identified with their linguistic expressions, and they do not in principle require any language in order to be accessible to rationally ideal beings that are capable of grasping them in an entirely non-sensible way. Presumably, these beings would possess a logical source of knowledge that is so powerful that it doesn't require language at all in order to produce acts of thought. This idea again recalls Leibniz's account of the nature of thought, and in particular of his admission that God and the angels were exactly such rational beings who do not – like human beings – require language in order to think (Leibniz 1704/1765, Bk. IV, ch. 5, §1). They do not require language precisely because their attention is not distracted or dominated by the continuous impact of sense impressions.

As opposed to this, Frege points out human beings require language in order to become conscious of a thought. And this, together with the fact that ordinary language – the kind of language in which human beings normally learn to think – is shaped also by other, less rational aspects of human nature, explains for Frege why actual human thought (as opposed to the bare content of pure thought, or that at which an act of thinking, as part of human consciousness, has to aim in order to be a thought at all) is prone to impurity through the influence of the language in which it is normally clad.

These results raise doubts about Michael Dummett's  notorious claim that Frege brought the modern tradition to an end by replacing epistemology with the theory of meaning as the foundation of philosophy in general (1981a: 669f.).  Dummett's central claim about Frege's philosophy of language is that Frege simply converted traditional problems of epistemology into questions about language (1991: 111-112).  The question, for instance, of how "numbers [are] given to us, if we cannot have any ideas or intuitions of them" raised by Frege in §62 of Foundations, is clearly epistemological. However, according to Dummett, it simply becomes the question of how we refer to, that is, succeed in talking about, numbers. And as Dummett understands this question, it is answered simply by Frege's account of the meanings of conventionally introduced expressions. The problem with this interpretation is that, presumably, for Frege any complete account of how expressions can possess meaning at all would have to involve a complete account of how we can grasp and understand pure thoughts – and it does not appear that he thought this question could be sufficiently answered with recourse to language simply because for Frege language itself presupposes certain rational capacities in order to be capable of expressing thoughts.

This seems to be precisely why Frege repeatedly takes refuge in various metaphors to indicate the existence of certain rational faculties that enable us to grasp a thought, like the mysterious "power of thinking" that he talks about in "Thought". Indeed, in a draft dating from 1897 he explicitly describes the act of thinking as "perhaps the most mysterious of all", and adds that he regards the question of how it is possible as "still far from being grasped in all its difficulty" (1979:145). At the same time, he explicitly denies that this question could ever be answered in terms of empirical psychology or in terms of logic. Certainly, then, he could not seriously hold that specifying a relation between expressions and what they designate, or between sentences and their truth-values, could ever fully replace the question of how it is possible that we can think of anything at all.

Consequently, this also means that a philosophy of language in Frege's view could never be more than a fragment of a complete philosophy of human thought, albeit an important one. Dummett is aware that in this sense, Frege's philosophical account of thought and understanding is still incomplete; however, it is doubtful that Frege would have agreed that it could be completed by reflecting further on the uses and functions of language – which is Dummett's own proposal (1981:413). In fact, whether the question of what thoughts consist in and what their preconditions are could be completely settled within the philosophy of language or not has been one of the major – and most interesting – issues of dispute in 20th century analytic philosophy.  (For detailed discussions of Dummett's interpretation of Frege see Dummett and Lotter 2004, chap. 2.4.)

2. The Formal Language Approach

We now begin to understand why language was a serious matter to Frege, even though he did not consider it his primary object of interest. His interest in the philosophy of language was based on his firm belief that language is necessary for human thought, and it was triggered in particular by his investigations into the foundations of mathematics, in which he faced a serious problem concerning the symbolic tools that were available at the time for such investigations. In his 1919 "Notes for Ludwig Darmstaedter," he describes the problem that first led him to investigate language as follows:

I started out from mathematics. The most pressing need, it seemed to me, was to provide this science with a better foundation. I soon realized that number is not a heap, a series of things, nor a property of a heap either, but that in stating a number that we have arrived at as the result of counting we are making a statement about a concept.

The logical imperfections of language stood in the way of such investigations. I tried to overcome these obstacles with my concept-script. In this way I was led from mathematics to logic" (1979:253).

Frege Points out that the logical imperfections of language – by which he means the natural language of everyday life, or the "language of life", as he sometimes calls it – had proven to be an obstacle for his investigations into the ontology of numbers and the epistemology of mathematics, especially arithmetic. He was trying to find out whether all arithmetic formulas could be proven on the basis of logical axioms and definitions alone, and whether numbers could therefore be construed as logical objects – a view that later came to be called "logicism." In order to find this out, Frege had to see just "how far one could get in arithmetic by inferences alone, supported only by the laws of thought that transcend all particulars" (1997:48). However, the formula language of arithmetic, in which numbers and their relations are expressed, did not contain expressions for specifically logical relations; and ordinary language proved to be insufficiently transparent with regard to the discovery of logical relations – especially logical consequence – to serve Frege's purposes well. Therefore, Frege decided to create what he regarded as a logically superior notational system for arithmetic – a notational system that was supposed to be as transparent as possible with respect to the logical structure of thought in that area, and one that contained symbols not only for arithmetical entities but also for specifically logical relations and concepts. Moreover, each term contained or introduced into this notational system should be given a precise and fixed meaning by way of definitions in terms of small number of primitive terms.

a. The Concept Script

Following Adolf Trendelenburg (in his 1867 essay "On Leibniz's Project of a Universal Characteristic") Frege baptized his new symbolic system "Begriffsschrift".  (Although "Begriffsschrift" is usually translated as "concept script" or "conceptual notation", it is sometimes translated differently; in Frege 1952, for example, it is translated as "ideography".)  He gives two independent reasons for the choice of this terminology: First – as he explains in the preface to Conceptual Notation – because in it all and only that part of the content of natural language expressions is to be represented that is of significance for logical inference; and this is what Frege called the "conceptual content" of an expression (1997:49). Secondly – as we learn again from his 1882 piece mentioned earlier – Frege means by "Begriffsschrift" a symbolic system in which, contrary to natural language, the written symbols come to express their subject matter directly, that is, without the intervention of speech (1972:88). In this way, expressions of conceptual content could be radically abbreviated; for instance, a simple statement could be accommodated in one line as a formula of the concept script. Frege also decided to represent complex statements of propositional logic – statements linking two or more simple statements – in a two-dimensional manner for reasons of perspicuity.

Historically, the idea of a concept script derives from the Leibnizian project of developing a so-called "universal characteristic" (characteristica universalis): A universal symbolic system in which every complex concept is completely defined based on a set of primitive concepts and logical rules of inference and definition, and which thus enables us to make the conceptual structure of our universe explicit. Such a symbolic system would also contain a logical calculus (calculus ratiocinator) consisting of purely syntactic inference rules based on the types of symbols used within the formal language. However, according to the Leibnizian conception, logic itself is not merely a calculus but expressible in an ideal language, that is, in the universal characteristic. Frege certainly adopted this view of logic from Leibniz; his main source of his understanding of Leibniz's conception very likely was again Trendelenburg's essay (Sluga 1980, ch. 2.4). However, 20th and 21st century mainstream analytic philosophy has somewhat misleadingly characterized Frege as regarding logic itself as a universal language rather than a calculus (for example, van Heijenoort, 1967).

The latter characterization is misleading for two reasons. The first is that, as we have seen, Frege did not regard language as the source of thought contents; he did regard logic, however, as consisting of (true) thought contents (though this has been recently disputed for the Frege of the Conceptual Notation period in Linnebo 2003). Hence, he could not have regarded logic as being identical with any language. Secondly, Frege did not actually attempt to develop his concept script as a universal language in Leibniz's sense (though he agrees that logic itself contains universally applicable laws of thought). Rather, he held the more cautious belief that if such a language could be developed at all, its development would have to proceed gradually, in a step-by-step manner:

"Arithmetical, geometrical and chemical symbols can be regarded as realizations of the Leibnizian conception in particular fields. The concept script offered here adds a new one to these – indeed, the one located in the middle, adjoining all the others. From here, with the greatest prospect of success, one can then proceed to fill in the gaps in the existing formula languages, connect their hitherto separate fields into the domain of a single formula language and extend it to fields that have hitherto lacked such a language" (1997:50).

Thus, Frege intended his concept script primarily for the expression of logical relations within the realm of arithmetic – the field that he saw as located in the middle of all other areas of possible inquiry. He did seem optimistic that his concept-script could be successfully applied "wherever a special value has to be placed on the validity of proof" (ibid.); and this seemed appropriate not only with regard to mathematics but also with regard to "fields where, besides conceptual necessity, natural necessity prevails" – that is, the pure theory of motion, mechanics and physics (ibid.). He also expressed – in the 1882 piece mentioned earlier – the belief that in principle the concept-script could be applied wherever logical relations pertain, and that therefore philosophers as well should pay attention to it. However, he was never ambitious or even interested in examining how it could be applied to areas that were remote from arithmetic.

Frege's revival of the idea of a universal, logically ideal language for the analysis and advancement of science and human knowledge subsequently became extremely influential especially through the writings of Russell and the early Wittgenstein and it contributed to the development of Logical Positivism in the first half of the 20th century. Rudolf Carnap and other members of the Vienna Circle actually worked on the establishment of a universal formal language of science in which not only every scientific theory could be expressed in a unified way, but also every meaningful philosophical problem would be soluble by way of logical reconstruction (Carnap 1928a and 1928b). Still in the fifties and sixties of the last century, after attempts at establishing a universal formal language of science had eventually proven unsuccessful, Nelson Goodman practiced and endorsed an axiomatic approach -- based on the idea of multiple formal reconstructions of certain areas of philosophical inquiry -- for investigating the conceptual relation between universals and particulars and between the world of phenomenal experience and that of physical objects (Goodman 1951, 1963). Frege, by contrast, never applied his concept-script to fields other than logic and mathematics, choosing an informal, argumentative (rather than formal) and "constructivist" approach to dealing with philosophical issues arising from – or underlying – his logicist project. Some remarks in the preface to Conceptual Notation might give us a clue as to why he did not go so far as Carnap and Goodman in his adherence to formula language in philosophical inquiry. There, Frege uses the analogy of the microscope and the eye in order to explain the relation between ordinary language (or the "language of life", as Frege calls it) and concept-script:

The latter (that is, the eye), because of the range of its applicability and because of the ease with which it can adapt itself to the most varied circumstances, has a great superiority over the microscope. Of course, viewed as an optical instrument it reveals many imperfections, which usually remain unnoticed only because of its intimate connection with mental life. But as soon as scientific purposes place strong requirements upon sharpness of resolution, the eye proves to be inadequate. On the other hand, the microscope is perfectly suited for just such purposes; but, for this very reason, it is useless for all others" (1972:105).

According to Frege, the concept-script is not to replace ordinary language in all its uses; on the contrary, he regards it as "useless" in all contexts but "scientific" ones. Given this belief, it remains undecided whether Frege regarded philosophy itself as an entirely scientific discipline or whether he thought that there are areas of philosophy in which the concept-script would be useless in principle. That he never even considered formalizing his claims about perception, meaning, the nature of thought, or the basis of objectivity may be taken as some evidence for the latter, although it would not be conclusive.

b. The Logical Imperfections of Ordinary Language

What all of these "formal language" approaches have in common is not merely the insight that ordinary language lacks a certain amount of transparency when it comes to exploring the meanings and logical relations between words and sentences. It is moreover the assumption that an artificial formula language is in principle able to capture the logical structure of thought – or even of the world itself as it is reflected in thought – better than any natural language that characterizes the approach to language taken by Frege – and after him Russell, the early Wittgenstein, and the Logical Positivists.

The following is a brief survey of what Frege considered the most prominent logical impurities of natural language that stood in the way of his logical investigations into the foundations of arithmetic, and how Frege thought them to be eliminated in a logically perfect language like his concept-script.

i. Non-Observance of the Difference Between Concept and Object

According to Frege, the difference between concept and object is not generally well observed in natural languages. Often, the same word serves to designate both a concept and an object that falls under it. The word "horse", for instance, sometimes serves to denote a concept, as in "This is a horse", other times a single object, as in "This horse is black", and sometimes also an entire biological species, as in "The horse is an herbivorous animal" (1972:84). Even though we could read the second sentence above as "There is exactly one x at location y such that x is a horse and x is black", thereby maintaining the same logical category for "horse" as in the first sentence, this syntactical structure is not transparent in ordinary language. In a logically ideal language, by contrast, every word or complex expression would have to stand for exactly one object, concept, or relation, and it would have to be clear from the syntax of the language -- that is, from the syntactical categories of the expressions themselves -- to which of those ontological categories the entity designated belongs. Thus, the logical syntax of the language would reflect the logical structure within the realm of entities to which it is applied.

The main rationale for Frege's strict distinction between concepts and objects, as well as their corresponding syntactic categories, appears to lie in his understanding of logical unity. In his "Notes for Ludwig Darmstaedter" Frege points out that:

[W]here logic is concerned, it seems that every combination of parts results from completing something that is in need of supplementation; where logic is concerned, no whole can consist of saturated parts alone. The sharp separation of what is in need of supplementation from what is saturated is very important" (1983:254).

Frege does not think that a logical unit such as a sentence,  a thought, or truth value could consist of components all of which are logically complete; such components could not really hang together to constitute a logical whole. Rather, in order to account for the possibility of logically complex units at all, we have to assume that they are composed of a combination of two types of logical components; saturated, complete, self-subsisting ones, on the one hand, and unsaturated, incomplete ones – ones that essentially are in need of supplementation – on the other. On the level of ontology, Frege calls every unsaturated entity a "concept" or "relation", and every saturated one an "object". Up until the very last phase of his intellectual career, he included in the latter category not only physical things, and psychological events, but also abstract entities like sets, numbers, truth values, and even entire thoughts (in his specific sense of that which is grasped in an act of thinking).

On the syntactic level, the contrast between saturated and unsaturated entities is reflected in the distinction between proper names, on the one hand, and predicates (which Frege calls "concept-words") on the other. In this sense, we can say that in Frege, syntactic distinctions as well as relations are not only presupposed in the creation of any meaningful linguistic unit but they already have a meaning in themselves. Thus, the mere combination of a proper name with a predicate in a logically ideal language as such already expresses something – namely, it expresses that an object falls under a concept (which was for Frege the most basic logical relation one can think of).

A proper name in Frege's sense is any singular expression, that is, a proper name is any expression that serves to designate one and only one particular object; a predicate, by contrast, designates a concept or a relation. Thus, the class of Fregean proper names in ordinary language comprises not only names in the narrow sense like "Aristotle" but also any other expression that is used to refer to one particular object. Notoriously, since at least from 1891 onwards Frege conceives of truth values as objects and of sentences as referring to truth values (1892a), he regards complete sentences of ordinary language as proper names as well – unlike assertions or asserted judgments, which are represented in the concept script by means of an assertion sign (1906a; 1979:195).

ii. Empty Proper Names

Besides its lack of exact correspondence between syntactical and ontological categories, another problem of ordinary language – which Frege encountered not only in fictional but also in scientific contexts – is that of empty proper names. These are grammatically well-formed singular expressions that do not happen to denote anything, or that apply to more than one thing and therefore do not actually fulfill their function as singular terms. One example that Frege cites is the syntactically well-formed expression "the celestial body most distant from the Earth"; it is doubtful whether this expression denotes anything at all. This is even more obvious with expressions like "the least rapidly convergent series", which are just as void of an object of designation as is the name "Odysseus" (1892a; 1952:58; 1997:153). In his very late phase, Frege traces back the paradoxes of set theory, which brought about the failure of his logicist project, to this very problem of empty singular terms in natural language, as it had misled him into believing that sets,  (that is, extensions of concepts) and numbers were logical objects (1979:269f.; 1997:369f.).

In a logically perfect language, by contrast, "every expression grammatically well constructed as a proper name out of signs already introduced shall in fact designate an object, and... no new sign shall be introduced as a proper name without being secured a significance" (1952:70, 1997:163). In addition Frege suggested that, if need be, an artificial significance could be stipulated for all those proper names that turn out to lack reference to an actually existing object (ibid.).

iii. The Vagueness of Predicates

According to Frege, while proper names serve to designate objects, concept-words serve to designate concepts, which as such belong to an entirely separate logical category (1892:5). This is also reflected in the use of concept-words, which -- in contrast to proper names -- can refer even if no object falls under the concept they designate (1979:123ff). Nonetheless, a concept-word lacks significance just like an empty proper name if it does not clearly express under which conditions an object falls under the designated concept and under which it doesn't. For Frege, the logic of pure thought cannot acknowledge concepts with undetermined boundaries (1891a, 1891b).

It seems obvious that most, if not all, concept-words in natural language lack the kind of semantic precision that Frege expects of a logically perfect language. For instance, do we know exactly under what conditions anyone falls under the concept of baldness and under what conditions s/he does not? If not then – barring the remote possibility that there really is a sharp boundary of which we are more or less ignorant – most if not all ordinary language concept-words have vague meanings in Frege's sense. Hence, strictly speaking most, if not all, concept-words in ordinary language would lack significance, according to Frege's logic.

In a logically perfect language – as Frege conceived of it – the vagueness of predicates could be eliminated through their arrangement in an axiomatic system, through logical analysis, as well as informal elucidations and clarification of the primitive terms by way of examples. Frege strictly distinguishes definitions from illustrative examples. The latter, together with other forms of elucidation, merely serve to clarify the meanings of primitive signs (signs whose meanings cannot be analyzed further into logical components). Theoretically, one would never be able to fully clarify the meaning of such an expression by way of examples; however, according to Frege "we do manage to come to an understanding about the meanings of words" in practice. Whether we do, of course, will in this case always depend on a "meeting of minds, on others guessing what we have in mind" (1914/1979:207).

Definitions in the proper sense are constructive, in that they introduce a new sign to abbreviate a more complex expression that we have constructed out of its logical components. Frege distinguishes from these purely stipulative definitions cases of what were in his time called "analytic definitions". These display a logical analysis of the sense of a sign that has long been in use before by identifying its sense with that of a complex expression; this sense then is a function of the senses of the latter's logical parts. In this case the meaning equation is not a mere matter of arbitrary stipulation but can only be recognized by "an immediate insight."

iv. Grammatical versus Logical Categories

For Frege, the logician's main goal in her struggle with language is to "separate the logical from the psychological;" that is, the logician's main goal in her struggle with language is to isolate the logically relevant aspects of grammar and meaning from those that are not. Frege defines "logically relevant aspects of grammar" as only those aspects of language that have a bearing on logical inference (1979:4). Accordingly, as philosophers interested in pure thought we "have to turn our backs on" any grammatical distinctions and elements of meaning that are not relevant for logical inferences, or that may even obscure them.

This includes, but is not limited to, the grammatical distinction between the subject and the predicate of a sentence, which Frege contends misled logicians for centuries. Grammatically speaking, the subject of a sentence is the expression that signifies what the sentence is "about", or as Frege puts it, the subject of the sentence is "the concept with which the judgment is chiefly concerned" (1979:113). The predicate, by contrast, would then be the expression that signifies what is being said about the subject or, alternatively, the concept that is applied to the subject. So, for instance, in the sentence "Archimedes perished at the conquest of Syracuse," the word "Archimedes" appears to be the subject; and "…perished at the conquest of Syracuse, "the predicate. According to Frege, however, the grammatical distinction between subject and predicate, which used to be the model for traditional logic, does not match the logical structure of that part of the content of sentences that is relevant for logic.

More precisely, Frege thought the distinction between subject and predicate to be neither necessary nor sufficient to describe the logical structure of thought. It is not necessary because it yields distinctions between sentences that appear to have the same logical power of inference. For instance, the following two sentences obviously are grammatically distinct:

(1) "At Plataea the Greeks defeated the Persians."
(2) "At Plataea the Persians were defeated by the Greeks."

In (1) "the Greeks" appears to be the grammatical subject, while in (2) it is "the Persians". Yet from a logical point of view the two sentences have the same conceptual content, and therefore do not need to be distinguished in a logically perfect language (ibid.:112f.); all the consequences that can be derived from (1) combined with certain others can also be derived from (2) combined with the same others, which means that the logically relevant part of their content, which Frege decides to call "conceptual content", is the same.

The second reason why Frege thought the grammatical distinction between subject and predicate is unnecessary for the expression of, or distinction between, conceptual contents and their components is that, logically speaking, the linguistic expression of a judgment or assertion can always be rephrased as a combination of a nominal phrase, which contains the entire conceptual content, and a grammatical predicate like "is a fact" or "is true", which does not add anything to that content. Hence, as Frege points out, "we can imagine a language in which the proposition "Archimedes perished at the conquest of Syracuse" would be expressed in the following way: "The violent death of Archimedes at the conquest of Syracuse is a fact" (1879, §3; 1972:113). In such a case the grammatical subject contains the whole content of the judgment and the predicate serves only to present this content as a judgment; hence, strictly speaking, nothing at the level of conceptual content -- at the level of what is relevant to logical inference -- corresponds to the predicate here. In fact, for Frege a logically ideal language like the concept-script is a language in which the only grammatical predicate is "is a fact", represented by a combination of the so-called judgment stroke " |-" and the content stroke "~"; and occurring to the left of judgable contents (" ….") (1879, §2). Because Frege conceives of such contents as identical to the contents of nominal phrases and thus all complete expressions in his system are names (or "terms" in Russellian terminology), his sentential logic today is sometimes called "term logic" (for example, Zalta 2004) as opposed to standard propositional logic, in which propositions or sentences are regarded as a logical category distinct from both predicates and terms.

Furthermore, even for cases when we do seem to be able to use the distinction between predicate and subject to analyze judgable contents into their components, Frege thought the grammatical opposition of subject and predicate to be insufficient for capturing important logical distinctions that apply to the contents of sentences in a logically ideal language. In particular, it does not appear to suffice for an analysis of the differences between singular, particular, and general propositions. Singular propositions, according to Frege, are those in which an object is subsumed or falls under a concept; this is what he regarded as the fundamental relation in logic to which all others can be reduced (1979:118). Nevertheless, for the purposes of understanding the structure and logical impact of general and existential propositions, Frege distinguishes two other structural relations within conceptual contents: First, that of subordination or bringing something under something else, which pertains between two concepts of the same logical order; and second, that of a concept's falling within a concept of higher order.

In a proposition like "All whales are mammals", for instance, the expression "all whales" again appears as grammatical subject, but "all whales" does not seem to denote a particular object, hence it cannot be construed as a proper name. Instead, what we actually mean is this: "If anything is a whale then it is a mammal". This indicates that what the sentence actually is about is a relation between two concepts, that of a whale and that of a mammal. What the sentence says about these concepts is that whatever falls under the first also falls under the second; it thereby subordinates the first under the second concept (1979:119; 1884, §47). However, the second concept is not a property of the first; being a mammal is not a property of the concept of being a whale but rather of the objects falling under that concept, just as being a whale itself is. Hence, the two concepts are of the same logical order – they both apply to objects.

This is different in statements that concern the existence of things of a certain kind. If one says "Mammals exist", or "Some mammals are elephants" then one is not talking about about any particular mammal or elephant but rather about the concepts of a mammal or an elephant; and what one means is that these concepts are satisfied in at least one case. Frege, therefore, regards existence as a concept of the second order. A concept of the second order is one that applies to concepts of the first order; that is, a concept of the second order does not apply to objects but to concepts of the first order, and it is concepts of the first order, not concepts of the second order, that apply directly to objects. Thus, contrary to the use of ordinary language, statements like "Caesar exists" turn out to be senseless because they contain a category mistake (1892b/1997:189). By contrast, we could meaningfully say, "There is one man named 'Caesar;'" but in this case one is again ascribing existence to a concept; that is, one is ascribing existence to the concept of being named "Caesar". Moreover, if one rephrases her original singular existence statement as "There is one and only one man named Caesar", she does not only say something false (for surely there have been plenty of people baptized "Caesar") but is again just referring to the concept of being named "Caesar;" that is, one is again incorrectly stating that the name "Caesar" applies to exactly one object.

For these reasons, Frege decided to replace the traditional logical distinction between subject and predicate (which in his view is derived from the grammatical distinction between subject and predicate expressions) with the distinction between function and argument a distinction with which he was familiar through his expertise in mathematical analysis. In Conceptual Notation, this distinction is introduced in connection with the notion of judgment. For Frege, "in the expression of a judgment we can always regard the combination of symbols to the right of the turnstile as a function of one of the symbols occurring in it" (1879, §11).  As one can see, the terms "function" and "argument" apply to to expressions rather than to what they stand for. In Conceptual Notation those terms in fact are still used for both; only later did Frege reserve them for those entities that a functional expression and an argument expression respectively stand for.

Functional expressions typically contain placeholders (or variables), which in singular sentences have to be replaced by an argument in order to determine a definite truth-value. For instance, the expression "2 + x = 5" is functional in the sense that its truth-value depends on the value of the variable "x" that occurs in it. If "x" is replaced by "3" then the expression becomes a true sentence or formula of arithmetic; if it is replaced by any other numeral the resulting sentence or formula will be false. Thus, for Frege a function is what such a functional expression stands for. A potential argument for that function is an entity denoted by an expression that serves to supplement the functional expression so as to yield a complete sentence. On the basis of this distinction between function and argument, Frege achieved a new, mathematically oriented understanding of concepts and relations: a concept simply is a function whose value always is a truth value for any suitable argument, and a relation is a function that has more than one such argument place. This idea of concepts or relations as functions covers even cases of higher-order properties: those are conceived of as functions that take on only other, lower-order functions as arguments so as to determine a truth-value. Finally, by contrast to subject-predicate analyses of expressions and their meanings, the distinction between function and argument can be applied also to those logical components that do not by themselves constitute complete sentences, that is, the distinction can be applied to operations like that expressed by "the father of ( )".

v. The Intermingling of Subjective and Objective Aspects of Meaning

The general motivation for Frege's abandonment of logical distinctions that are, in his view, still too close to the grammar of natural language was his conviction that ordinary language grammar "is a mixture of the logical and the psychological" (1979:3)  He thought that theses two areas of inquiry should be strictly distinguished both with regard to the questions they raise and to their respective ways of answering them. This anti-psychologism about logic itself extends also to the contents of natural language and thought. As we saw above, one of Frege's reasons for calling his symbolic system "concept-script" was the fact that it was supposed to represent only that part of the content of natural language expressions that is of significance for logical inference. This implies, however, that according to Frege the content of ordinary language expressions comprises more than just their "conceptual content". Frege is quite explicit about this point both in early and in later writings. Concerning the two sentences "At Plataea the Greeks defeated the Persians" and "At Plataea the Persians were defeated by the Greeks" he points out in Begriffsschrift that:

Even if one can perceive a slight difference in sense, the agreement still predominates. Now I call the part of the content which is the same in both the conceptual content" (1972, §3:112).

It seems clear that the words "sense" and "content" are being used to cover both logically relevant and other aspects of the meaning of a linguistic expression; for the former constitute only part of the content of an expression. The meaning of "sense" (Sinn) in Frege's later writings comes closer to that of "conceptual content" in his earlier works. However, the general word "content" still appears to retain its very broad use in works that were written even after Frege's famous distinction between sense and significance. In a letter to Husserl, for instance, Frege points out that the content of a sentence can include more than just that which can be true or false: for example, a sentence content can also contain "a mood, feelings, and ideas", none of which can be judged as true or false and none of which, therefore, concerns logic (1906b:106). Note that at this point, interestingly, Frege's criterion of the logical relevance of linguistic content is no longer articulated in terms of inference but rather in terms of the capacity to be true or false. Frege here lays the ground for that movement in 20th century philosophy of language that rests on the principle that linguistic meaning consists solely in truth conditions, and that therefore a theory of meaning can either be derived from or is identical to a theory of truth – a movement whose most prominent representative was Donald Davidson.

However, the isolated word "content" in Frege's own writings still covers both logically relevant and logically irrelevant aspects of ordinary language meaning. Hence, to distinguish the two, and sort out the latter, is in Frege's view one of the main tasks of the logician. What is also peculiar about Frege's view of natural language content is that he appears to regard all of that part of it which is logically irrelevant as being purely subjective and thus a matter only of psychology, as his mentioning of "moods, feelings, and ideas" already shows. That is, he does not appear to recognize any but subjective and purely psychological meaning elements that are not, strictly speaking, logically relevant. He writes:

The task of logic being what it is, it follows that we must turn our backs on anything that is not necessary for setting up the laws of inference. In particular, we must reject all distinctions in logic that are made from a purely psychological standpoint and have no bearing on inference.... In the form in which thinking naturally develops the logical and the psychological are bound up together. The task in hand is precisely that of isolating what is logical" (between 1879 and 1891, in 1979:3).

According to Frege, such logically irrelevant distinctions include "all aspects of language that result only from the interaction of speaker and listener" such as all information conveyed to the latter by way of intonation or word-order in order to draw the listener's attention to a particular part of speech (between 1879 and 1891, in 1979:3). They also include merely connotational differences between words denoting the same entities, as exemplified by groups of expressions like "walk", "stroll", and "saunter". Though all of these expressions stand for the same concept, Frege thinks that they all act in different ways on the imagination of the listener, adding to the meaning of the sentences in which they are used an element that is irrelevant to logical inference. Whether one says, "This dog howled the whole night", or one says, "This cur howled the whole night," makes no difference with regard to the logical inferences one can draw from them in connection with sentences, nor with regard to their truth or falsity. One tends to associate with the word "cur" rather unpleasant ideas;  however, for Frege, even if one disagrees that these associations match the dog in question, this would still not make the second sentence above false (1979:140).

According to how Frege characterizes these extra-logical, yet, rule-governed features of ordinary language meaning, these are not different from the merely arbitrary association of images with certain words in the minds of individual speakers. In other words, the difference between the meanings of the words "dog" and "cur" would be just as intangible and subjective as the difference between the internal image that a horseman, painter, or zoologist may have come to associate with the name "Bucephalus" and which Frege considers just as subjective "coloring and shading" of a piece of linguistic information (1997:154). And while Frege admits that "without some affinity in human ideas art would certainly be impossible," he does not seem to see – or be interested in exploring – the conventional rules that govern the difference in meaning between the pejorative "cur" and the neutral "dog"(1997:155).

In other words, Frege does not even seem to acknowledge an entire field of philosophy of language that has been explored subsequently by John Austin, John Searle, Paul Grice and others and that is based on the assumption that we can philosophically – not just psychologically – explore the meaning of utterances as opposed to, or even underlying, the meaning of sentences. Frege reduces this entire area of inquiry to "all aspects of language that result only from the interaction of speaker and listener", and he thereby overlooks that the phenomena described above do not result just from the interaction between two people. Rather, they are either based on conventional rules and maxims – adherence to which is generally rational or even essential for the possibility of linguistic communication – or at least presuppose knowledge of some such maxims or conventions in order to be properly understood. Therefore, solutions of problems connected to speaker meaning and speech acts are not at all just a matter of psychology; rather, they are at least as philosophically important in any comprehensive account of linguistic communication as problems of the relation between expressions and things in the world, or between expression and what they express.

3. From Conceptual Contents to Sinn and Bedeutung: The Development of Frege's Semantics

The development of Frege's view of the semantics of a logically perfect language can be divided up in two major phases, corresponding to two styles of semantic analysis that Frege consecutively adopted. Following Alberto Coffa, we can regard the first as a form of semantic monism and the second as a form of semantic dualism (1991:79f.). What both styles have in common is a broadly picture-theoretic idea of the relation between language and world, and a corresponding ideal of semantic analysis; to serve its purpose, language has to be partitioned into basic syntactical units, each of which is to be associated with an appropriate semantic correlate, which is conceived as an entity. For this reason, monism and dualism can also be regarded as varieties of an entity theory of meaning as defined more recently by Lycan (2000: 78, 83). This is so at least if we keep in mind that for Frege not all those entities that his semantic theory associates with linguistic expressions are supposed to be "individual things", as Lycan's characterization of an entity theory of meaning suggests. Rather, as we have seen, some semantic entities in Frege are intrinsically incomplete, like concepts and relations.

A disagreement between monism and dualism arises with regard to the number and character of the entities that are associated with the logical components of sentences. The monist believes that only one such entity needs to be postulated in order to explain how linguistic expressions mean anything and how sentences can be true or false. The dualist, by contrast, holds that linguistic expressions can have truth value potential only if we assign them not one but two different kinds of values, one of which then becomes our link to extra-linguistic reality (that is, to the entities denoted by expressions of our language).

a. The Monism of Frege's Early Semantics

Frege's early account of semantics given in Conceptual Notation and Foundations appears to be monistic in the sense above. Frege's early semantics is based on the notion of a conceptual content, that is, it is based on that part of meaning that is relevant for logical inferences. The class of conceptual contents in turn is divided up into judgable and non-judgable ones, whereby the former are logically composed of and can be decomposed into the latter. What Frege may have had in mind – although he does not put it exactly this way – with his distinction between judgable and non-judgable contents is the following consideration: a judgable content is such that we can reasonably either affirm or deny it: it is acceptable to say "Archimedes's death is/is not true", where one of the two alternatives must be correct. Thus, "Archimedes death" is a judgable content. However, this is different in a statement like "This house is/is not true " – unless we take it to be elliptic for something like "The existence of this house is/is not true". For a house by itself (unlike its existence) does not belong to the category of things for which the question of whether they are true or false is logically appropriate under the law of excluded middle (tertium non datur), since by itself it can be neither true nor false (alternatively, we can say that it is both not true and not false). For this reason, "this house" is a non-judgable content.

In Conceptual Notation and Foundations, Frege does not appear to acknowledge any ontological difference between a non-judgable content and the object or function that the expression having this content stands for. There are at least three main pieces of textual as well as theoretical evidence for this. The first has to do with Frege's early account of identity as a relation between signs.  Conceptual content in Frege's early account is explained by recourse to the illustrative example of the the two propositions "At Plataea the Greeks defeated the Persians" and "At Plataea the Persians were defeated by the Greeks". This appears to be the first example Frege gives for the relation of "identity of content". The relation then is explicitly introduced in §8 of Conceptual Notation. There it is explained in the following way:

Identity of content differs from conditionality and negation by relating to names, not to contents. Although symbols are usually only representative of their contents...they at once appear in propria persona as soon as they are combined by the symbol for identity of content, for this signifies the circumstance that the two names have the same content" (1972:124).

As Frege points out, the symbol of content identity has the peculiarity that wherever it is used the resulting judgment no longer is about the contents of the names connected by the identity sign but rather about those names themselves. What such a judgment of identity expresses then is that those names have the same content, whatever this content is. Because Frege considers judgable contents to be fully expressible by nominal phrases of the form "The violent death of Archimedes at the conquest of Syracuse", and as he considers the concept-script to be a symbolism in which every judgable content is so expressed, we can include names and nominal phrases that stand for judgable contents among the symbols that are suitable candidates for the relation of content identity.

Somewhat later in the same paragraph, Frege goes on to explain what exactly he means by the content of a name in the context of identity of content. He does so in order to show why the identity sign does not merely serve to state trivial tautologies or to introduce abbreviations for complex expressions. Taking an example from geometry he lets a straight line rotate about a fixed point 'A' on the circumference of a circle. This shows that 'A' can be determined in various ways; for instance, it can be determined either directly through perception, or indirectly, through a description. 'A' is also uniquely determined as the point corresponding to the rotating straight line's being perpendicular to the diameter of the circle on 'A'. Thus, for Frege the need of a special symbol for identity of content rests on the fact that the same content, in this case point 'A', can be determined in different ways and that this fact cannot always be known in advance; rather, it is itself the content of a judgment that requires proof.

Thus, what Frege regards as the conceptual content of a geometrical name, that is, of the description of a single object, appears to be the object itself: the same train of thought that he applied to geometrical points, their ways of determination, and their names, can also be applied to physical (or any other) objects.  Frege contends that the conceptual content of the name "evening star" is the planet Venus, as is the conceptual content of the name "morning star", though this content is determined in each case in a different way. In the case of names for judgable contents, the object seems to be a true or false circumstance, whereby its truth or falsity are themselves to be regarded as part of the conceptual content in this case. For after his distinction between sense and significance Frege would point out that he has now divided up what he regarded as judgable content in his earlier account into the thought on the one hand and its truth value on the other (1891c:63). Thus, a judgable content in Frege's early semantics comprises both aspects while – at least in the case of names – a non-judgable content does not appear to contain more than the object denoted by the name. It does not, apparently, contain the way this object is determined – instead, this way of being determined is conceived of as part of the name itself: there is, in a certain sense, no clear logical distinction between the name as a purely syntactic string of characters and its symbolic character or force, in virtue of which it is able to pick out the object it denotes, in Frege's early semantics.

More concrete evidence for the monistic character of Frege's early semantics arises from the fact that it does not allow for the difference between meaningful sentences that lack a truth-value on the one hand, and sentences that are completely meaningless on the other. In other words, it does not account for the existence of sentences expressing mock thoughts, which are so plentiful both in fiction and everyday life. This would not be so, had Frege's early semantics incorporated a second layer of meaning, which a sentence or expression can possess even if nothing exists to which it actually refers. Frege appears to be quite aware of the advantage that his later distinction between sense and significance in this respect provided. In Foundations he still took it for granted that an expression that fails to denote anything lacks any sense or meaning (1884, §§97: 100-102). After his distinction between sense and significance, however, he is quick to point out that he would now prefer to replace the word "Sinn" ("sense") in those contexts by "Bedeutung" ("reference" or "significance") (1980:63).

Finally, objects and concepts – the entities that expressions of a logically perfect notational system would stand for – are discussed in Foundations in the context of Frege's distinction between objective and subjective ideas, a distinction that was supposed to help clarify Kant's "true views":

An idea [Vorstellung] in the subjective sense is what is governed by the psychological laws of association; it is of a sensible, pictorial character. An idea in the objective sense belongs to logic and is in principle non-sensible, although the word which refers to an objective idea is often accompanied by a subjective idea, which nevertheless is not its significance. Subjective ideas are often demonstrably different in different people, objective ideas are the same for all. Objective ideas can be divided into objects and concepts. I shall myself, to avoid confusion, use "idea" only in the subjective sense. It is because Kant associated both meanings with the word that his doctrine assumed such a very subjective, idealist complexion, and his true view was made so difficult to discover. The distinction here drawn stands or falls with that between psychology and logic. If only these themselves were to be kept always rigidly distinct!" (1884, §27, n.).

Frege claims to have clarified the Kantian view with his distinction between objective and subjective ideas. It is disputable just how serious we are to take this lip service to Kantianism, and it is also doubtful that Kant would have accepted Frege's proposed amendment – for Kant and Frege do not appear to have shared the same notion of objectivity. Nevertheless, Frege's terminological amendment here certainly serves to clarify his own earlier terminology; for in Conceptual Notation, he still uses the expression "combinations of ideas" to refer to judgable contents (1879, §2). In light of this, however, claiming that objective ideas can be divided up into objects and concepts, as Frege does in the above passage, supports the notion that those judgable contents -- as combinations of objective ideas -- were at the same time combinations of objects and concepts. Thus, this too supports the claim that early Fregean linguistic symbols have only one semantic dimension, namely, the objects, concepts, and true or false judgable contents that they designate.

One should note that Frege's distinction between subjective and objective ideas (the latter includes physical objects and properties), as well as his later distinction between the inner and the outer realms of entities, suggests that "subjective", inner states of the mind (like acts of thinking) cannot be conceived of in physical terms. This, of course, is in striking contrast to physicalist accounts of "the mental" and may strike many contemporary philosophers of mind as naive.

b. Sense and Significance

Around 1891, Frege revised his semantics. This revision solves a number of problems that the earlier, monistic account is not able to handle without further expansion. According to Frege's mature account, each expression has a sense ("Sinn"), which contains a unique way in which the object (or function) that the expression stands for is given to us. The sense is a way an object is determined by an expression . (Roughly, "sense" in Frege's 1891 account resembles a way an object is determined by an expression in his earlier account.) The object or function that the expression stands for is the expression's significance ("Bedeutung"), also called "reference" or "referent" both in English translations of Frege's work and in Anglo-Saxon Frege scholarship. It follows that for each particular sense there can be maximally one significance/reference, while numerous distinct senses may correspond to the same significance, representing the various ways the object (or concept) that an expression stands for can be uniquely given to us in thought. For Frege, not only proper names but also concept words and relational expressions possess sense and significance. Their significance then is a concept or relation, not an object, and their sense – though Frege does not say much about it – presumably consists in a logical thought component that contains the necessary and sufficient conditions for an object to fall under the concept (or stand in the relation to another object). Finally, the sense of a complete sentence is a thought, and its significance a truth-value.

Although the terms "Sinn" and "Bedeutung" appear already in Foundations of 1884, the distinction itself and the semantic account connected with it do not occur in Frege's writings before 1891.  Part of that distinction is a logical bifurcation of what Frege earlier calls the "judgable content" into a truth-value and a thought as the truth-value bearer. At the same time, the new account classifies ways an object is given as logical components of thoughts, while the relation between ways an object can be determined according to his earlier account to the judgable contents of which it is a logical component had never been clarified. Thus, the new account appears more consistent and complete with regard to the question of how semantic wholes are composed of their parts. On both levels, that of sense and that of significance, wholes are conceived of as functionally composite units that depend on the nature of their parts. On each level, moreover, the unit of a whole requires the supplement of a function by a suitable argument. A truth-value for Frege simply is the value of a concept or relation relative to certain arguments. Likewise, a thought is a composite of senses, at least one of which plays the part of a function and the other of its argument.

Furthermore, the new account opens up an approach to the semantics of fictional language, that is, it opens up an approach to sentences "about" fictional characters or locations. Such sentences typically contain thoughts that have no truth-value because one or the other of their logical components – senses of fictional terms – lacks a corresponding significance in terms of a real object (or concept). Frege's idea here is based on the dependence of truth-values on arguments and functions – the non-existence of an object corresponding to a specific sense amounts to the lack of an argument for the functional part of the sentence, and therefore leads to the lack of a value for that function in this case.

Also, the distinction between sense and significance allows for an expansion of Frege's semantics to belief ascriptions, that is, to sentences of the form "John believed that the earth is flat." The idea is that this sentence may be true independently of whether the embedded part of it ("the earth is flat") is true. But this means that -- since the truth-value of the entire sentence functionally depends on the significance of each part -- what the embedded part stands for cannot be a truth-value. Rather, Frege concludes that in the case of indirect speech and belief ascriptions, embedded sentences take on their original sense – the thought they normally express – as an indirect significance. Thus, while the thought they normally express is their sense in direct speech, it becomes their significance in indirect speech.

Finally, the distinction between sense and significance gives a more consistent account of the informative nature of certain kinds of identity statements (like "The evening star is the morning star") than Frege's earlier distinction between what is designated by a name and the way it is determined by means of the name. By introducing this new distinction, Frege no longer needs to regard the concept (or relation) of identity as having the peculiar feature of taking on names rather than objects themselves as its arguments. Thus, within his mature semantics, identity once again becomes an ontological relation in which each object stands to itself (though this has been recently disputed in Caplan & Thau 2001). Identity statements no longer are conceived as being about the fact that two different names have the same conceptual content but rather about the fact that the object given to us in one particular way is the same as the object given in another. The idea is similar to Frege's early solution to the puzzle of informative identity statements: some identity statements are informative insofar as they state that an object determined or given to us in one way is the same as an object determined or given to us in some other way. However, how this idea is theoretically applied and connected to a general account of semantic content appears more consistent in Frege's later semantics than in his earlier one.

c. Some Issues of Translation

There have been a number of suggestions as to how to translate "Bedeutung" as opposed to "Sinn" in later Frege into English. Besides "meaning", which in 1970 was officially chosen as the standard translation in all Blackwell editions of Frege's works because of its exegetical neutrality (see Beaney 1997: 36, n. 84), the two main other alternatives that have been proposed are "reference" and "significance", by Dummett and Tugendhat, respectively. Dummett also suggests that we distinguish between "reference" for the relation between an expression and the object it refers to and "referent" for this object itself (1981a:93f.). The term "meaning", by contrast, is problematic as a translation for "Bedeutung" because meaning often is taken to be either something like sense – that is, the thought connected to a sentence in our minds – or something like the rules of use for an expression in any given context: but none of this is what Frege had in mind when he spoke of "Bedeutung".

Tugendhat's proposal to translate "Bedeutung" in Frege as "significance" is based on the insight that, while "reference" or "referent" may be regarded as an adequate rendering of "Bedeutung" in the case of proper names, it is quite misleading in that of predicate expressions (Tugendhat 1970:177; cp.. Dummett 1981a:182f.). Indeed, Frege himself points out that in the case of concepts we could not properly speak about the "Bedeutung" – in the sense of "referent" – of the expression, since then we would imply that we were talking about an object, which cannot be the case in light of Frege's distinction between objects and concepts (1997: 177, 365). Thus, rendering "Bedeutung" always as "reference" or "referent" would in fact require us to introduce some general notion of "entity", which comprises both concepts and objects in order to explain just what  "Bedeutung" in general is. However, Frege obviously never saw any need for such a general, all-embracing ontological category like "entity".

Dummett admits that besides the idea of the name-bearer relation, which he regarded as Frege's prototype relation of reference, a secondary aspect of reference must be acknowledged as well, which consists in the semantic role of the respective expression, that is, in its contribution the truth-values of sentences in which it may occur (1981a:190f.). On this view, predicate expressions behave like proper names in having the function of contributing to the truth-values of sentences in which they occur by means of their respective references, though their semantic role is different from that of proper names. However, Tugendhat (1970) claims that "Bedeutung" in Frege should be understood to always mean primarily the semantic role of an expression, that is, its truth-value potential, and precisely for this reason "Bedeutung" should be translated as "significance" or "importance". The main evidence in favor of this interpretation is that, for Frege, which reference an expression has, and whether it has any at all, is logically significant only for determining the truth-values of the sentences in which it may occur (as well as whether they have a truth-value at all). Thus, for Tugendhat, there appears to be no additional aspect of the reference of proper names that would justify regarding it as the "prototype" semantic relation, that is, as somewhat superior to the relation between predicates and the concepts or relations that they stand for.

Unlike "reference", "significance" as a candidate translation for Fregean "Bedeutung" has the advantage that it is generally accepted as a regular connotative aspect of the various meanings of "Bedeutung" in standard German usage, and that it is explicitly used in this meaning by Frege himself (1997:80; cp.. Gabriel 1984:192). Moreover, it seems to be supported by an important principle that Frege endorses, namely, the so-called context principle.

d. The Context Principle and the Priority of Judgments over Concepts

According to the context principle, which is most explicitly stated in Foundations – though nowhere called "context principle" by Frege himself – the sense and/or significance of a word cannot be explained or inquired after in isolation but only in the context of a proposition/sentence (1984: x, §106). It has been a matter of scholarly dispute whether Frege understood this principle to be about sense, or about significance, or about both, since at the time of Foundations the distinction between the two had not been made yet. There has also been a long debate about what exactly the principle implies and how it is to be understood, especially since in one of its formulations, Frege goes so far as to state that a word possesses sense and/or significance only in the context of a sentence (ibid., §62). In fact, this latter formulation has received the most attention in the secondary literature, leading to a widespread conviction that Frege proposes a principle of semantic holism.

However, some scholars, including Dummett, claim that Frege drops the principle in his later writings while others argue that there are passages even in later writings where Frege seems to articulate semantic or non-semantic versions of it in the light of the distinction between sense and significance. For instance, in "Notes for Ludwig Darmstaedter," Frege points out that one comes at the parts of a thought only by analyzing the whole – which may be taken as a version of the context principle as a holistic principle at the level of sense (1997:362). It is also conceivable to regard the context principle, as some scholars have, as a semantic version of what has been called the "principle of priority of judgments over concepts" (see Bell 1979, Sluga 1980), which figures in Frege's very early writings composed before Foundations. According to this latter principle, which Frege explicitly presents as a novel principle in the history of logic, the judgment and its content are to be regarded as logically primitive while concepts, as components of judgable contents in Frege's early account, are derivative logical entities that can be isolated only by analysis of judgable contents (1979:17, 1983:19). In this respect, Frege is thought to deviate from traditional Aristotelian logic much further than logicians of his time or earlier, who tend to naively presuppose the concepts required to create judgable contents as independently given.

Be that as it may, Tugendhat's claim is that the context principle was an early statement by Frege that points to his conception of "Bedeutung" as truth-value potential and thus to "significance" as the most basic and general meaning of that term (1970:182; cp.. Gabriel 1984:189ff.). It is clear from this that he believed Frege to have held the context principle as a principle about the dependency of significance on truth-value, that is, on what is characteristically denoted only by sentences. For why should a word have significance only in the context of a sentence if not for the reason that its significance simply consists in a truth-value potential, and that sentences are the only kind of expressions considered as true or false? From this it naturally follows that the question of whether an expression has significance can only arise in connection with the question of whether a sentence is true or false. And this idea indeed is used extensively in Frege's later writings, especially in the context of his distinction between the realms of  art and science (1997:157). "Bedeutung" in this sense is a purely normative term always directed towards an aim or value. And what Frege appears to focus on in "On Sense and Reference" is the question relative to what value or aim the relation of proper names to the objects they stand for - that is, their reference in Dummett's terminology - is significant: namely, relative to the scientific value of truth alone, and this is a value that only sentences can have.

However, one should note that the context principle has been perceived to clash with another principle commonly assigned to Frege, namely, that of the principle of functionality or compositionality. According to this principle, as it has been interpreted by some scholars, the senses of sentences are ultimately made up of atomic building blocks. According to this interpretation, then, Frege was an atomist and not a holist about meaning components; and this view -- though irreconcilable with the context principle, at least as it has been commonly understood -- would support Dummett's interpretation of the reference relation between names and objects as the paradigm relation of logical semantics. (For a detailed critical overview and discussion of the debate about the context principle and the principle of compositionality in Frege see Pelletier 2000).

4. References and Further Reading

a. Frege's Writings

  • 1879. Begriffsschrift, eine der arithmetischen nachgebildete Formelsprache des reinen Denkens, Halle: L. Niebert; reprinted in Frege 1998a; trans. as "Begriffsschrift, a Formula Language, Modeled upon that of Arithmetic, for Pure Thought" in From Frege to Gödel, edited by J. van Heijenoort, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press 1967, and as "Conceptual Notation" in Frege 1972; selections in Frege 1997.
  • 1879-1891: "Logik", in Frege 1983: 1-8; trans. as "Logic" in Frege 1979: 1-8.
  • 1880/1: "Booles rechnende Logik und meine Begriffsschrift", in Frege 1983: 9-52; trans. As "Boole's Logical Calculus and the Concept-Script", in Frege 1979: 9-46.
  • 1882: "Über die wissenschaftliche Berechtigung einer Begriffsschrift", in Zeitschrift für Philosophie und philosophische Kritik 81: 48-56; repr. in Frege 1998: 106-14; trans. as "On the Scientific Justification of a Begriffsschrift", in Frege 1972: 83-89.
  • 1884: Die Grundlagen der Arithmetik, eine logisch mathematische Untersuchung über den Begriff der Zahl, Breslau: W. Koebner; reprinted with an introduction and afterword by J. Schulte, Stuttgart: Reclam 1987; trans. by J. L. Austin as The Foundations of Arithmetic: A Logico-Mathematical Enquiry into the Concept of Number in Frege 1953; selections in Frege 1997.
  • 1891a: "Funktion und Begriff", Jena: Hermann Pohle, 1891; reprinted in Frege 1990: 125-42; trans. as "Function and Concept" in Frege 1984: 137-56, in Frege 1952: 21-41, and in Frege 1997:130-48.
  • 1891b: "Über das Trägheitsgesetz", in Zeitschrift für Philosophie und philosophische Kritik 98: 145-61; reprinted in Frege 1990: 113-24; trans. as "On the Law of Inertia" in Frege 1984: 123-36.
  • 1891c: Letter to Husserl of 5/24/1891, in Frege 1976: 94-98; trans. in Frege 1980: 61-64.
  • 1892a: "Über Sinn und Bedeutung", in Zeitschrift für Philosophie und philosophische Kritik 100: 25-50; reprinted in Frege 1990: 143-62; trans. as "On Sense and Meaning" Frege 1984: 157-77, as "On Sinn and Bedeutung" in Frege 1997: 151-71, and as "On Sense and Reference" in Frege 1952: 56-78.
  • 1892b: "Über Begriff und Gegenstand", in Vierteljahresschrift für wissenschaftliche Philosophie 16: 192-205, reprinted in Frege 1990: 167-178; trans. as "On Concept and Object" in Frege 1980: 182-94, in Frege 1952: 42-55, and in Frege 1997: 181-93.
  • 1892-95: "Ausführungen über Sinn und Bedeutung", in Frege 1983: 128-36; trans. as "Comments on Sense and Meaning" in Frege 1979: 118-25, and as "Comments on Sinn and Bedeutung" in Frege 1997: 172-80.
  • 1893: Die Grundgesetze der Arithmetik, vol. I, Jena: Verlag Hermann Pohle; reprinted in Frege 1998b; incomplete translation in Frege 1982.
  • 1903: Die Grundgesetze der Arithmetik, vol. II, Jena: Verlag Hermann Pohle; reprinted in Frege 1998b; trans. in Frege 1982.
  • 1906a: "Einleitung in die Logik", in Frege 1983: 201-18; trans. as "Introduction to Logic" in Frege 1979: 185-96, and in Frege 1997: 293-8.
  • 1906b: "Brief an Husserl, 9.12.1906", in Frege 1976: 105-6; trans. in Frege 1997: 305-307.
  • 1914: "Logik in der Mathematik" in Frege 1983: 219-70; trans. as "Logic in Mathematics" in Frege 1979: 203-50.
  • 1918: "Der Gedanke", in Beiträge zur Philosophie des deutschen Idealismus 1 (1918-9): 58-77, reprinted in Frege 1990: 342-78; trans. as "Thoughts" in Frege 1984: 351-72, and as "Thought" in Frege 1997: 325-45.
  • 1919a: "Die Verneinung", in Beiträge zur Philosophie des deutschen Idealismus 1 (1918-19): 143-57, reprinted in Frege 1990: 362-78; trans. as "Negation" in Frege 1984: 373-89 and in Frege 1997: 346-61.
  • 1919b: "Aufzeichnungen für Ludwig Darmstaedter" in Frege 1983: 273-77; trans. as "Notes for Ludwig Darmstaedter" in Frege 1979: 253-57, and in Frege 1997: 362-7.
  • 1924/5: "Erkenntnisquellen der Mathematik und der mathematischen Naturwissenschaften", in Frege 1983: 286-294; trans. as "Sources of Knowledge of Mathematics and the Mathematical Natural Sciences" in Frege 1979: 267-274.
  • 1952: Translations from the Philosophical Writings of Gottlob Frege, ed. by: Geach and M. Black, Oxford: Basil Blackwell.
  • 1953: The Foundations of Arithmetic: A Logico-Mathematical Enquiry into the Concept of Number/Die Grundlagen der Arithmetik, eine logisch mathematische Untersuchung über den Begriff der Zahl, Oxford: Basil Blackwell.
  • 1972: Conceptual Notation and Related Articles, ed. by T. W. Bynum. London: Oxford University Press.
  • 1976: Wissenschaftlicher Briefwechsel, Hamburg: Felix Meiner Verlag; trans. as Frege 1980.
  • 1979: Posthumous Writings, trans. by: Long and R. White, Oxford: Basil Blackwell.
  • 1980: Philosophical and Mathematical Correspondence, trans. by H. Kaal, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • 1982: The Basic Laws of Arithmetic, ed. and trans. by Montgomery Furth, Berkeley: University of California Press.
  • 1983: Nachgelassene Schriften, ed. by H. Hermes, F. Kambartel, F. Kaulbach, Hamburg: Felix Meiner Verlag (2nd ed.).
  • 1984: Collected Papers on Mathematics, Logic and Philosophy, trans. by M. Black, V. Dudman: Geach, H. Kaal, E.-H. W. Kluge, B. McGuinness, and R. H. Stoothoff, New York: Basil Blackwell.
  • 1990: Kleine Schriften, ed. by I. Angelelli, Hildesheim: Georg Olms Verlag (2nd ed.); trans. as Frege 1984.
  • 1997: The Frege Reader, ed. M. Beaney, Oxford: Basil Blackwell.
  • 1998a: Begriffsschrift und andere Aufsätze, ed. by I. Angelelli, Hildesheim: Georg Olms Verlag (2nd ed. reprint); trans. by T. W. Bynum as Frege 1972.
  • 1998b: Die Grundgesetze der Arithmetik I/II, Hildesheim: Georg Olms Verlag (2nd reprint of the 1893/1903 editions); trans. as Frege 1982.

b. Other Recommended Literature

i. General Introductions and Companions to Frege's Work

  • Baker, G.P. and P.M. S. Hacker, 1984, Frege: Logical Excavations, New York: Oxford University Press.
    • Comprehensive introduction to and critique of Frege’s work from a Wittgensteinian perspective; takes issue especially with Dummett’s interpretation of Frege.
  • Beaney, Michael, 1997: "Introduction" in Frege 1997: 1-46.
    • Good and concise introduction to both Frege’s work and the state of Frege scholarship at the time.
  • Bynum, Terrell W., 1972: "On the Life and Work of Gottlob Frege", in Frege 1972: 1-54.
    • Good first source of information on Frege, including biographical information about his life and career.
  • Currie, Gregory, 1982, Frege: An Introduction to His Philosophy, Sussex: Harvester Press.
    • Good and well-written general introduction to Frege’s work with emphasis on his epistemological and ontological views and his indebtedness to the Kantian tradition.
  • Dummett, Michael, 1978: "Frege's Philosophy", in Dummett, M., Truth and Other Enigmas, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press; earlier version published in the Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Volume 3), ed. Edwards, New York: MacMillan, 1967.
    • One of the first attempts to locate Frege's place within the history of philosophy; good as a very first orientation but opinionated and no longer generally accepted.
  • Dummett, Michael, 1981b, The Interpretation of Frege's Philosophy, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
    • Is a follow-up to Dummett’s Frege: Philosophy of Language and contains extensive discussions of and defense against Sluga’s critique of that book.
  • Gabriel, Gottfried and Uwe Dathe (eds.), 2000, Gottlob Frege: Werk und Wirkung, Paderborn: Mentis Verlag.
    • In German; contains historical assessments of Frege's work and influence on 20th century philosophy on occasion of his 150th birthday; also contains his hitherto unpublished proposals for a reform of the Germanelection law.)
  • George, Alexander and Richard Heck (1998, 2003): "Frege, Gottlob", In E. Craig (ed.), Routledge Encyclopedia of Philosophy, London: Routledge.
    • Very concise; good to get a very first overview over Frege’s work, especially in the philosophy of logic and mathematics.
  • Haaparanta, Leila and Jaakko Hintikka (eds.), 1986, Frege Synthesized. Boston: D. Reidel
    • Contains specialized articles on various aspects of Frege’s thought.
  • Ricketts, Thomas G. (ed.), The Cambridge Companion to Frege, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, forthcoming.
    • Contains scholarly articles on all the main aspects of Frege’s thought.
  • Schirn, Matthias (ed.), 1976, Studien zu Frege, 3 vols., Stuttgart-Bad Cannstatt: Verlag Frommann-Holzboog.
    • Contains various scholarly interpretations of the core aspects of Frege’s work; articles in German and English.
  • Schirn, Matthias (ed.), 1996, Frege – Importance and Legacy, Berlin-New York: DeGruyter.
    • Contains further scholarly interpretations of the core aspects of Frege’s work.
  • Sluga, Hans, 1980, Gottlob Frege, London: Routledge & Kegan Paul.
    • Comprehensive historical introduction; lays emphasis on the historical roots and background of Frege’s thought in 19th century German philosophy, especially Lotze; good to gain a comprehensive picture of the original historical setting of Frege’s thought.
  • Sluga, Hans (ed.), 1993, The Philosophy of Frege, 4 vols., New York: Garland Publishing.
    • Contains specialist papers on various aspects of Frege’s thought.
  • Weiner, Joan, 1999, Frege (Past Masters), Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • Brief and concise; good as first introduction.
  • Weiner, Joan, 2004, Frege Explained, Open Court Publishing.
    • Even briefer; good as first introduction.
  • Wright, Crispin (ed.), 1984, Frege: Tradition and Influence, Oxford: Basil Blackwell.
    • Contains specialist papers on various aspects of Frege’s thought.

ii. General Introductions to the Philosophy of Language

  • Devitt, Michael and Kim Sterelny, 1999, Language and Reality: An Introduction to the Philosophy of Language, 2nd edition, The MIT Press.
    • Decent introduction to the philosophy of language from a naturalistic point of view; may presuppose some familiarity with ‘analytic’ terminology.
  • Lycan, William, 2000, Philosophy of Language, London/New York: Routledge.
    • Good overview over the various problems and theories in 20th century analytic philosophy of language; includes questions for discussion and further references; does not presuppose particular familiarity with analytic terminology.
  • Nye, Andrea, 1998 (ed.), Philosophy of Language: The Big Questions, London: Basil Blackwell.
    • Comprehensive anthology of text fragments from various sources with introductory essays by the editor.

iii. On (Various Aspects of) Frege’s Philosophy of Language

  • Beaney, Michael, 1996, Frege: Making Sense. London: Duckworth.
  • Bell, David, 1979, Frege's Theory of Judgment, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Burge, Tyler, 1979: "Sinning against Frege", The Philosophical Review 88: 398-432.
  • Burge, Tyler, 1986: "Frege on Truth", in Haaparanta/Hintikka 1986.
  • Burge, Tyler, 1990: "Frege on Sense and Linguistic Meaning", in Bell/Cooper 1990.
  • Caplan, Ben & Mike Thau, 2001: "What's Puzzling Gottlob Frege?", Canadian Journal of Philosophy 31, 2: 159-200.
  • Carl, Wolfgang, 1994, Frege's Theory of Sense and Reference, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Dummett, Michael, 1981a, Frege: Philosophy of Language, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press (2nd ed.).
  • Gabriel, Gottfried, 1984: "Fregean Connection: Bedeutung, Value and Truth-Value", in Wright 1984.
  • Greimann, Dirk, 2003, Freges Konzeption der Wahrheit, Hildesheim: Georg Olms Verlag.
  • Pelletier, Francis Jeffry, 2000: "Did Frege Believe Frege's Principle?" Journal of Logic, Language, and Information 10: 87-114.
  • Sluga, Hans, 2002: "Frege on Truth", in Reck 2002.
  • Tugendhat, Ernst 1970: "The Meaning of "Bedeutung" in Frege", Analysis 30: 177-189.

iv. Other Philosophy of Language Relevant to or Referenced in this Article

  • Carnap, Rudolph, 1956, Meaning and Necessity, Chicago: University of Chicago Press (2nd ed.).
  • Grice, Paul, 1989, Studies in the Ways of Words, Cambridge, Mass: Harvard University Press.
  • Russell, Bertrand, 1905: "On Denoting", Mind 14: 479-93; reprinted in Russell, B., 1956, Logic and Knowledge, London.
  • Searle, John, 1969, Speech Acts: An Essay in the Philosophy of Language, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

v. Some Specialized Literature on the Epistemological Dimensions of Frege’s Thought

  • Burge, Tyler, 1992: "Frege on Knowing the Third Realm", Mind 101: 633-650.
  • Carl, Wolfgang, 1994, Frege's Theory of Sense and Reference, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Lotter, Dorothea, 2004, Logik und Vernunft: Freges Rationalismus im Kontext seiner Zeit, Freiburg: Karl Alber Verlag.
  • Weiner, Joan, 1990, Frege in Perspective, Ithaca: Cornell University Press.

vi. General Contributions and Companions to the History of Early Analytic Philosophy

  • Bell, David and Neil Cooper (eds.), 1990, The Analytic Tradition, Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Coffa, Alberto, 1991, The Semantic Tradition from Kant to Carnap to the Vienna Station, L. Wessels (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Dummett, Michael, 1991a, Frege and Other Philosophers, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Dummett, Michael, 1993, The Origins of Analytical Philosophy, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Reck, Erich (ed.), 2002, From Frege to Wittgenstein: Perspectives on Early Analytic Philosophy, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Tait, William W. (ed.), 1997, Early Analytic Philosophy: Essays in Honor of Leonard Linsky, La Salle.

vii. Literature on Other Aspects of Frege's Philosophy

  • Dummett, Michael, 1991b, Frege: Philosophy of Mathematics, London: Duckworth; repr. 1995.
  • Linnebo, Øystein, 2003: "Frege's Conception of Logic: From Kant to the Grundgesetze", Manuscrito 26: 2 (2003), 235-252.
  • Van Heijenoort, Jean, 1967: "Logic as Calculus and Logic as Language", Synthese 17, 324–330.

viii. Other Literature Referenced in this Article

  • Carnap, Rudolph, 1928a, Der Logische Aufbau der Welt, Berlin: Weltkreis Verlag; trans. by Rolf A. George as The Logical Structure of the World, in Carnap 2003.
  • Carnap, Rudolph, 1928b, Scheinprobleme in der Philosophie, Berlin: Weltkreis Verlag; trans. by Rolf A. George as Pseudoproblems in Philosophy in Carnap 2003.
  • Carnap, Rudolph, 2003, The Logical Structure of the World/Pseudoproblems in Philosophy, Open Court Publishing.
  • Goodman, Nelson, 1951, The Structure of Appearance, Dordrecht: Reidel.
  • Goodman, Nelson, 1963: "The Significance of Carnap's Der logische Aufbau der Welt," in Schilpp 1963.
  • Hobbes, Thomas, 1655, De Corpore, Part I: Computatio Sive Logica, tr. by A. Martinich as Logic, New York: Abaris 1981.
  • Kant, Immanuel, 1781/1786, Kritik der reinen Vernunft, Riga: Johann Friedrich Hartknoch, 1st edition (A), 1781; 2nd edition (B), 1787; ed. and transl. by: Guyer and A. Wood as Critique of Pure Reason, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press 1997.
  • Leibniz, Gottfried Wilhelm, 1704/1765, Nouveaux Essais Sur L'Entendement Humain, ed. and trans. as New Essays on the Human Understanding by: Remnant and J. Bennett, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press 1981.
  • Locke, John, 1690, An Essay Concerning Human Understanding, ed. by P.H. Nidditch, Oxford: Clarendon Press 1975.
  • Trendelenburg, Friedrich Adolf, 1867: "Über Leibnizens Entwurf einer allgemeinen Charakteristik", Historische Beiträge zur Philosophie, vol. III, Berlin.

c. Related Articles

Author Information

Dorothea Lotter
U. S. A.

Nagarjuna (c. 150—c. 250)

NagarjunaOften referred to as "the second Buddha" by Tibetan and East Asian Mahayana (Great Vehicle) traditions of Buddhism, Nagarjuna offered sharp criticisms of Brahminical and Buddhist substantialist philosophy, theory of knowledge, and approaches to practice. Nagarjuna's philosophy represents something of a watershed not only in the history of Indian philosophy but in the history of philosophy as a whole, as it calls into questions certain philosophical assumptions so easily resorted to in our attempt to understand the world.  Among these assumptions are the existence of stable substances, the linear and one-directional movement of causation, the atomic individuality of persons, the belief in a fixed identity or selfhood, and the strict separations between good and bad conduct and the blessed and fettered life.  All such assumptions are called into fundamental question by Nagarjuna's unique perspective which is grounded in the insight of emptiness (sunyata), a concept which does not mean "non-existence" or "nihility" (abhava), but rather the lack of autonomous existence (nihsvabhava).  Denial of autonomy according to Nagarjuna does not leave us with a sense of metaphysical or existential privation, a loss of some hoped-for independence and freedom, but instead offers us a sense of liberation through demonstrating the interconnectedness of all things, including human beings and the manner in which human life unfolds in the natural and social worlds.  Nagarjuna's central concept of the "emptiness (sunyata) of all things (dharmas)," which pointed to the incessantly changing and so never fixed nature of all phenomena, served as much as the terminological prop of subsequent Buddhist philosophical thinking as the vexation of opposed Vedic systems. The concept had fundamental implications for Indian philosophical models of causation, substance ontology, epistemology, conceptualizations of language, ethics and theories of world-liberating salvation, and proved seminal even for Buddhist philosophies in India, Tibet, China and Japan very different from Nagarjuna's own. Indeed it would not be an overstatement to say that Nagarjuna's innovative concept of emptiness, though it was hermeneutically appropriated in many different ways by subsequent philosophers in both South and East Asia, was to profoundly influence the character of Buddhist thought.

Table of Contents

  1. Nagarjuna's Life, Legend and Works
  2. Nagarjuna's Skeptical Method and its Targets
  3. Against Worldly and Ultimate Substantialism
  4. Against Proof
  5. The New Buddhist Space and Mission
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Nagarjuna's Life, Legend and Works

Precious little is known about the actual life of the historical Nagarjuna. The two most extensive biographies of Nagarjuna, one in Chinese and the other in Tibetan, were written many centuries after his life and incorporate much lively but historically unreliable material which sometimes reaches mythic proportions. However, from the sketches of historical detail and the legend meant to be pedagogical in nature, combined with the texts reasonably attributed to him, some sense may be gained of his place in the Indian Buddhist and philosophical traditions.

Nagarjuna was born a "Hindu," which in his time connoted religious allegiance to the Vedas, probably into an upper-caste Brahmin family and probably in the southern Andhra region of India. The dates of his life are just as amorphous, but two texts which may well have been authored by him offer some help. These are in the form of epistles and were addressed to the historical king of the northern Satvahana dynasty Gautamiputra Satakarni (ruled c. 166-196 CE), whose steadfast Brahminical patronage, constant battles against powerful northern Shaka Satrap rulers and whose ambitious but ultimately unsuccessful attempts at expansion seem to indicate that he could not manage to follow Nagarjuna's advice to adopt Buddhist pacifism and maintain a peaceful realm. At any rate, the imperial correspondence would place the significant years of Nagarjuna's life sometime between 150 and 200 CE. Tibetan sources then may well be basically accurate in portraying Nagarjuna's emigration from Andhra to study Buddhism at Nalanda in present-day Bihar, the future site of the greatest Buddhist monastery of scholastic learning in that tradition's proud history in India. This emigration to the north perhaps followed the path of the Shaka kings themselves. In the vibrant intellectual life of a not very tranquil north India then, Nagarjuna came into his own as a philosopher.

The occasion for Nagarjuna's "conversion" to Buddhism is uncertain. According to the Tibetan account, it had been predicted that Nagarjuna would die at an early age, so his parents decided to head off this terrible fate by entering him in the Buddhist order, after which his health promptly improved. He then moved to the north and began his tutelage. The other, more colorful Chinese legend, portrays a devilish young adolescent using magical yogic powers to sneak, with a few friends, into the king's harem and seduce his mistresses. Nagarjuna was able to escape when they were detected, but his friends were all apprehended and executed, and, realizing what a precarious business the pursuit of desires was, Nagarjuna renounced the world and sought enlightenment. After having been converted, Nagarjuna's adroitness at magic and meditation earned him an invitation to the bottom of the ocean, the home of the serpent kingdom. While there, the prodigy initiate "discovered" the "wisdom literature" of the Buddhist tradition, known as the Prajnaparamita Sutras, and on the credit of his great merit, returned them to the world, and thereafter was known by the name Nagarjuna, the "noble serpent."

Despite the tradition's insistence that immersion into the scriptural texts of the competing movements of classical Theravada and emerging "Great Vehicle" (Mahayana) Buddhism was what spurred Nagarjuna's writings, there is rare extended reference to the early and voluminous classical Buddhist sutras and to the Mahayana texts which were then being composed in Nagarjuna's own language of choice, Sanskrit. It is much more likely that Nagarjuna thrived on the exciting new scholastic philosophical debates that were spreading throughout north India among and between Brahminical and Buddhist thinkers. Buddhism by this time had perhaps the oldest competing systematic worldview on the scene, but by then Vedic schools such as Samkhya, which divided the cosmos into spiritual and material entities, Yoga, the discipline of meditation, and Vaisesika, or atomism were probably well-established. But new and exciting things were happening in the debate halls. A new Vedic school of Logic (Nyaya) was making its literary debut, positing an elaborate realism which categorized the types of basic knowable things in the world, formulated a theory of knowledge which was to serve as the basis for all claims to truth, and drew out a full-blown theory of correct and fallacious logical argumentation. Alongside it, within the Buddhist camp, sects of metaphysicians emerged with their own doctrines of atomism and fundamental categories of substance. Nagarjuna was to undertake a forceful engagement of both these new Brahminical and Buddhist movements, an intellectual endeavor till then unheard of.

Nagarjuna saw in the concept sunya, a concept which connoted in the early Pali Buddhist literature the lack of a stable, inherent existence in persons, but which since the third century BCE had also denoted the newly formulated number "zero," the interpretive key to the heart of Buddhist teaching, and the undoing of all the metaphysical schools of philosophy which were at the time flourishing around him. Indeed, Nagarjuna's philosophy can be seen as an attempt to deconstruct all systems of thought which analyzed the world in terms of fixed substances and essences. Things in fact lack essence, according to Nagarjuna, they have no fixed nature, and indeed it is only because of this lack of essential, immutable being that change is possible, that one thing can transform into another. Each thing can only have its existence through its lack (sunyata) of inherent, eternal essence. With this new concept of "emptiness," "voidness," "lack" of essence, "zeroness," this somewhat unlikely prodigy was to help mold the vocabulary and character of Buddhist thought forever.

Armed with the notion of the "emptiness" of all things, Nagarjuna built his literary corpus. While argument still persists over which of the texts bearing his name can be reliably attributed to Nagarjuna, a general agreement seems to have been reached in the scholarly literature. Since it is not known in what chronological order his writings were produced, the best that can be done is to arrange them thematically according to works on Buddhist topics, Brahminical topics and finally ethics Addressing the schools of what he considered metaphysically wayward Buddhism, Nagarjuna wrote Fundamental Verses on the Middle Way (Mulamadhyamakakarika), and then, in order to further refine his newly coined and revolutionary concept, the Seventy Verses on Emptiness (Sunyatasaptati), followed by a treatise on Buddhist philosophical method, the Sixty Verses on Reasoning (Yuktisastika).. Included in the works addressed to Buddhists may have been a further treatise on the shared empirical world and its establishment through social custom, called Proof of Convention (Vyavaharasiddhi), though save for a few cited verses, this is lost to us, as well as an instructional book on practice, cited by one Indian and a number of Chinese commentators, the Preparation for Enlightenment (Bodhisambaraka). Finally is a didactic work on the causal theory of Buddhism, the Constituents of Dependent Arising (Pratityasumutpadahrdaya). Next came a series of works on philosophical method, which for the most part were reactionary critiques of Brahminical substantialist and epistemological categories, The End of Disputes (Vigrahavyavartani) and the not-too-subtly titled Pulverizing the Categories (Vaidalyaprakarana). Finally are a pair of religious and ethical treatises addressed to the king Gautamiputra, entitled To a Good Friend (Suhrlekha) and Precious Garland (Ratnavali). Nagarjuna then was a fairly active author, addressing the most pressing philosophical issues in the Buddhism and Brahmanism of his time, and more than that, carrying his Buddhist ideas into the fields of social, ethical and political philosophy.

It is again not known precisely how long Nagarjuna lived. But the legendary story of his death once again is a tribute to his status in the Buddhist tradition. Tibetan biographies tell us that, when Gautamiputra's successor was about to ascend to the throne, he was anxious to find a replacement as a spiritual advisor to better suit his Brahmanical preferences, and unsure of how to delicately or diplomatically deal with Nagarjuna, he forthrightly requested the sage to accommodate and show compassion for his predicament by committing suicide. Nagarjuna assented, and was decapitated with a blade of holy grass which he himself had some time previously accidentally uprooted while looking for materials for his meditation cushion. The indomitable logician could only be brought down by his own will and his own weapon. Whether true or not, this master of skeptical method would well have appreciated the irony.

2. Nagarjuna's Skeptical Method and its Targets

At the heart of what is called skepticism is doubt, a suspension of judgment about some states of affairs or the correctness of some assertion. There are of course many things, both in the world and in the claims people make about the world, which can be doubted, questioned, rejected, or left in skeptical abeyance. But in addition to the many different things which can be doubted, there are also different ways of doubting. Doubt can be haphazard, as when a person sees another person at night and is unsure of whether that other person is his friend; it can be principled, as when a scientist refuses to take into account non-material or divine causes in a physical process she is investigating; it can be systematic, as when a philosopher doubts conventional explanations of the world, only in search of a more fundamental, all-inclusive explanation of experience, a la Socrates, Descartes or Husserl (Nagarjuna was for the most part a skeptic of this sort). It can also be all-inclusive and self-reflective, an attitude demonstrated by the Greek philosopher Pyrrho, who doubted all claims including his own claim to doubt all claims. Consequently, there are as many different kinds of skeptics as there can be found different kinds or ways of doubting. Nagarjuna was considered a skeptic in his own philosophical tradition, both by Brahmanical opponents and Buddhist readers, and this because he called into question the basic categorical presuppositions and criteria of proof assumed by almost everyone in the Indian tradition to be axiomatic. HiBut despite this skepticism, Nagarjuna did believe that doubt should not be haphazard, it requires a method. This idea that doubt should be methodical, an idea born in early Buddhism, was a revolutionary innovation for philosophy in India. Nagarjuna carries the novelty of this idea even further by suggesting that the method of doubt of choice should not even be one's own, but rather ought to be temporarily borrowed from the very person with whom one is arguing! But in the end, Nagarjuna was convinced that such disciplined, methodical skepticism led somewhere, led namely to the ultimate wisdom which was at the core of the teachings of the Buddha.

The standard philosophical interpretation of doubt in Indian thought was explained in the Vedic school of logic (Nyaya). Gautama Aksapada, the author of the fundamental text of the Brahminical Logicians, was probably a contemporary of Nagarjuna. He formulated what by then must have been a traditional distinction between two kinds of doubt. The first kind is the haphazard doubt about an object all people experience in their everyday lives, when something is encountered in one's environment and for various reasons mistaken for something else because of uncertainty of what precisely the object is. The stock examples used in Indian texts are seeing a rope and mistaking it as a snake, or seeing conch in the sand and mistaking it as silver. The doubt that can arise as a result of realizing one is mistaken or unsure about a particular object can be corrected by a subsequent cognition, getting a closer look at the rope for instance, or having a companion tell you the object in the sand is conch and not silver. The correcting cognition removes doubt by offering some sort of conclusive evidence about what the object in question happens to be. The other kind of doubt is roughly categorical doubt, exemplified specifically by a philosopher who may wonder about or doubt various categories of being, such as God's existence, the types of existing physical substance or the nature of time. In order to resolve this latter kind of philosophical doubt, the preferred method of the Logicians was a formal debate. Debates provided a space wherein judges presided, established rules for argument and counter-argument, recognized logical fallacies and correct forms of inference and two interlocutors seeking truth all played their roles in the establishment of the correct position. The point is that, according to traditional Brahminical thinking, certain and correct objective knowledge of the world was possible; one could in principle know whatever one sought to know, from what that object lying in darkness is to the types of causation that operated in the world to God's existence and will for human beings. Skepticism, though a natural attitude and a fundamental aid to human beings in both their everyday and reflective lives, can be overcome provided one arms oneself with the methods of proof supplied by common-sense logic. For Nyaya, while anything and everything can be doubted, any and every doubt can be resolved. The Brahminical Logician, the Naiyayika, is a cagey and realistic but staunch philosophical optimist.

The early Buddhists were not nearly so sure about the possibility of ultimate knowledge of the world. Indeed, the founder of the tradition, Siddhartha Gautama Sakyamuni (the "Buddha" or "awakened one"), famously refused to answer questions about such airy metaphysical ponderings like "Does the world have a beginning or not?", "Does God exist?" and "Does the soul perish after death or not?" Convinced that human knowledge was best suited and most usefully devoted to the diagnosis and cure of human beings' own self-destructive psychological obsessions and attachments, the Buddha compared a person convinced he could find the answers to such ultimate questions to a mortally wounded soldier on a battlefield who, dying from arrow-delivered poison, demanded to know everything about his shooter before being taken to a doctor. Ultimate knowledge cannot be attained, at least cannot be attained before the follies and frailties of human life bring one to despair. Unless human beings attain self-reflective, meditative enlightenment, ignorance will always have the upper hand over knowledge in their lives, and this is the predicament they must solve in order to alleviate their poorly understood suffering. The early traditional texts show how the Buddha developed a method for refusing to answer such questions in pursuit of ultimate, metaphysical knowledge, a method which came to be dubbed the "four error" denial (catuskoti). When asked, for example, whether the world has a beginning or not, a Buddhist should respond by denying all the logically alternative answers to the query; "No, the world does not have a beginning, it does not fail to have a beginning, it does not have and not have a beginning, nor does it neither have nor not have a beginning." This denial is not seen to be logically defective in the sense that it violates the law of excluded middle (A cannot have both B and not-B), because this denial is more a principled refusal to answer than a counter-thesis, it is more a decision than a proposition. That is to say that one cannot object to this "four error" denial by simply saying "the world either has a beginning or it does not" because the Buddha is recommending to his followers that they should take no position on the matter (this is in modern propositional logic known as illocution). This denial was recommended because wondering about such questions was seen by the Buddha as a waste of valuable time, time that should be spent on the much more important and doable task of psychological self-mastery. The early Buddhists, unlike their Brahminical philosophical counterparts, were skeptics. But in their own view, their skepticism did not make the Buddhists pessimists, but on the contrary, optimists, for even though the human mind could not answer ultimate questions, it could diagnose and cure its own must basic maladies, and that surely was enough.

But in the intervening four to six centuries between the lives of Siddartha Gautama and Nagarjuna, Buddhists, feeling a need to explain their worldview in an ever burgeoning north Indian philosophical environment, traded in their skepticism for theory. Basic Buddhist doctrinal commitments, such as the teaching of the impermanence of all things, the Buddhist rejection of a persistent personal identity and the refusal to admit natural universals such as "treeness," "redness" and the like, were challenged by Brahminical philosophers. How, Vedic opponents would ask, does one defend the idea that causation governs the phenomenal world while simultaneously holding that there is no measurable temporal transition from cause to effect, as the Buddhists appeared to hold? How, if the Buddhists are right in supposing that no enduring ego persists through our experienced lives, do all of my experiences and cognitions seem to be owned by me as a unitary subject? Why, if all things can be reduced to the Buddhist universe of an ever-changing flux of atoms, do stable, whole objects seem to surround me in my lived environment? Faced with these challenges, the monk-scholars enthusiastically entered into the debates in order to make the Buddhist worldview explicable. A number of prominent schools of Buddhist thought developed as a result of these exchanges, the two most notable of which were the Sarvastivada ("Universal Existence") and Sautrantika ("True Doctrine"). In various fashions, they posited theories which depicted causal efficacy as either present in all dimensions of time or instantaneous, of personal identity being the psychological product of complex and interrelated mental states, and perhaps most importantly, of the apparently stable objects of our lived experience as being mere compounds of elementary, irreducible substances with their "own nature" (svabhava). Through the needs these schools sought to fulfill, Buddhism entered the world of philosophy, debate, thesis and verification, world-representation. The Buddhist monks became not only theoreticians, but some of the most sophisticated theoreticians in the Indian intellectual world.

Debate has raged for centuries about how to place Nagarjuna in this philosophical context. Ought he to be seen as a conservative, traditional Buddhist, defending the Buddha's own council to avoid theory? Should he be understood as a "Great Vehicle" Buddhist, settling disputes which did not exist in traditional Buddhism at all but only comprehensible to a Mahayanist? Might he even be a radical skeptic, as his first Brahminical readers appeared to take him, who despite his own flaunting of philosophy espoused positions only a philosopher could appreciate? Nagarjuna appears to have understood himself to be a reformer, primarily a Buddhist reformer to be sure, but one suspicious that his own beloved religious tradition had been enticed, against its founder's own advice, into the games of metaphysics and epistemology by old yet still seductive Brahminical intellectual habits. Theory was not, as the Brahmins thought, the condition of practice, and neither was it, as the Buddhists were beginning to believe, the justification of practice. Theory, in Nagarjuna's view, was the enemy of all forms of legitimate practice, social, ethical and religious. Theory must be undone through the demonstration that its Buddhist metaphysical conclusions and the Brahminical reasoning processes which lead to them are counterfeit, of no real value to genuinely human pursuits. But in order to demonstrate such a commitment, doubt had to be methodical, just as the philosophy it was meant to undermine was methodical.

The method Nagarjuna suggested for carrying out the undoing of theory was, curiously, not a method of his own invention. He held it more pragmatic to borrow philosophical methods of reasoning, particularly those designed to expose faulty argument, to refute the claims and assumptions of his philosophical adversaries. This was the strategy of choice because, if one provisionally accepts the concepts and verification rules of the opponent, the refutation of the opponent's position will be all the more convincing to the opponent than if one simply rejects the opponent's system out of hand. This provisional, temporary acceptance of the opponent's categories and methods of proof is demonstrated in how Nagarjuna employs different argumentative styles and approaches depending on whether he is writing against the Brahmins or Buddhists. However, he slightly and subtly adapts each of their respective systems to suit his own argumentative purposes.

For the Brahminical metaphysicians and epistemologists, Nagarjuna accepts the forms of logical fallacies outlined by the Logicians and assents to enter into their own debate format. But he picks a variation on a debate format which, while acknowledged as a viable form of discourse, was not most to the Nyaya liking. The standard Nyaya debate, styled vada or "truth" debate, pits two interlocutors against one another who bring to the debate opposing theses (pratijna or paksa) on a given topic, for instance a Nyaya propoenet defending the thesis that authoritative verbal testimony is an acceptable form of proof and a Buddhist proponent arguing that such testimony is not a self-standing verification but can be reduced to a kind of inference. Each of these opposed positions will then serve as the hypothesis of a logical argument to be proven or disproven, and the person who refutes the adversary's argument and establishes his own will win the debate. However, there was a variety of this kind of standard format called by the Logicians the vitanda or "destructive" debate. In vitanda, the proponent of a thesis attempts to establish it against an opponent who merely strives to refute the proponent's view, without establishing or even implying his own. If the opponent of the proffered thesis cannot refute it, he will lose; but he will also lose if in refuting the opponent's thesis, he is found to be asserting or implying a counter-thesis. Now, while the Brahminical Naiyayikas considered this format good logical practice as it were for the student, they did not consider vitanda to be the ideal form of philosophical discourse, for while it could possibly expose false theses as false, it could not, indeed was not designed to, establish truth, and what good is reason or philosophical analysis if they do not or cannot pursue and attain truth?

For his own part, Nagarjuna would only assent to enter a philosophical debate as a vaitandika, committed to destroying the Brahminical proponents' metaphysical and epistemological positions without thereby necessitating a contrapositive. In order to accomplish this, Nagarjuna armed himself with the full battery of accepted rejoinders to fallacious arguments the Logicians had long since authorized, such as infinite regress (anavastha), circularity (karanasya asiddhi) and vacuous principle (vihiyate vadah) to assail the metaphysical and epistemological positions he found problematic. It should be noted that later, very popular and influential schools of Indian Buddhist thought, namely the schools of Cognition (Vijnanavada) and Buddhist Logic (Yogacara-Sautranta) rejected this purely skeptical stance of Nagarjuna and went on to establish their own positive doctrines of consciousness and knowledge, and it was only with later, more synthetic schools of Buddhism in Tibet and East Asia where Nagarjuna's anti-metaphysical and anti-cognitivist approaches gained sympathy. There was no doubt however that among his Vedic opponents and later Madhyamika commentators, Nagarjuna's "refutation-only" strategy was highly provocative and sparked continued controversy. But, in his own estimation, only by employing Brahminical method against Brahminical practice could one show up Vedic society and religion for what he believed they were, authoritarian legitimations of caste society which used the myths of God, divine revelation and the soul as rationalizations, and not the justified reasons which they were purported to be.

Against Buddhist substantialism, Nagarjuna revived the Buddha's own "four error" (catuskoti) denial, but gave to it a more definitively logical edge than the earlier practical employment of Suddhartha Gautama. Up to this point in the Indian Buddhist tradition, there had been two skeptics of note, one of them the Buddha himself and the other a third century sage named Moggaliputta-tissa, who had won several pivotal debates against a number of traditional sectarian groups at the request of the Mauryan emperor Asoka and had as a result written the first great debate manual of the tradition. While the Buddha had provided the "four error" method to discourage the advocacy of traditional metaphysical and religious positions, Moggaliputta-tissa constructed a discussion format which examined various doctrinal disputes in early Buddhism, which, in his finding, represented positions which were equally logically invalid, and therefore should not be asserted (no ca vattabhe). Perhaps inspired by this logically sharpened skeptical approach, Nagarjuna refined the "four errors" method from the strictly illocutionary and pragmatic tool it had been in early Buddhism into a logic machine that dissolved Buddhist metaphysical positions which had been growing in influence. The major schools of Buddhism had accepted by Nagarjuna's time that things in the world must be constituted by metaphysically fundamental elements which had their own fixed essence (svabhava), for otherwise there would be no way to account for persons, natural phenomena, or the causal and karmic process which determined both. Without assuming, for instance, that people had fundamentally fixed natures, one could not say that any particular individual was undergoing suffering, and neither could one say that any particular monk who had perfected his discipline and wisdom underwent enlightenment and release from rebirth in nirvana. Without some notion of essence that is, thought Nagarjuna's contemporaries, Buddhist claims could not make sense, and Buddhist practice could do no good, could effect no real change of the human character.

Nagarjuna's response was to "catch" this metaphysical position of Buddhist practice in the coils of the "four errors," demonstrating that the change Buddhism was after was only really possible if people did not have fixed essences. For if one really examines change, one finds that, according to the catuskoti, change cannot produce itself, nor can it be introduced by an extrinsic influence, nor can it result from both itself and an extrinsic influence, nor from no influence at all. All the logical alternatives of a given position are tested and flunked by the "four error" method. There are basic logical reasons why all these positions fail. It would first of all be incoherent (no papadyate) to assume that anything with a fixed nature or essence (svabhava) could change, for that change would violate its fixed nature and so destroy the original premise. In addition, we do not experience anything empirically which does not change, and so never know of (na vidyate) fixed essences in the world about us. Once again, the proponent's method has been taken up in an ingenious way to undermine his conclusions. The rules of the philosophical game have been observed, but not in this case for earning victory, but for the purpose of showing all the players that the game had all along had been just that, merely a game which had no tenable real-life consequences.

And so, Nagarjuna has rightly merited the label of skeptic, for he undertakes the dismantling of theoretical positions wherever he finds them, and does so in a methodically logical manner. Like the skeptics of the classical Greek tradition, who thought that resolved doubt about dogmatic assertions in both philosophy and social life could lead the individual to peace of mind, however, it is not the case that for Nagarjuna skepticism leads nowhere. On the contrary, it is the very key to insight. For in the process of dismantling all metaphysical and epistemological positions, one is led to the only viable conclusion for Nagarjuna, namely that all things, concepts and persons lack a fixed essence, and this lack of a fixed essence is precisely why and how they can be amenable to change, transformation and evolution. Change is precisely why people live, die, are reborn, suffer and can be enlightened and liberated. And change is only possible if entities and the way in which we conceptualize them are void or empty (sunya) of any eternal, fixed and immutable essence. Indeed, Nagarjuna even on occasion refers to his special use of the "four error" approach as the "refuting and explaining with the method of emptying" (vigraheca vyakhyane krte sunyataya vadet) concepts and things of essence. And like all properly Buddhist methods, once this logical foil has served its purpose, it can be discarded, traded in as it were for the wisdom it has conferred. Pretense of knowledge leads to ruin, while genuine skepsis can lead human being to ultimate knowledge. Only the method of skepticism has to conform to the rules of conventional knowing, for as Nagarjuna famously asserts: "Without depending on convention, the ultimate truth cannot be taught, and if the ultimate truth is not attained, nirvana will not be attained."

3. Against Worldly and Ultimate Substantialism

By Nagarjuna's lifetime, scholastic Buddhism had become much more than merely an institution which charged itself with the handing on of received scripture, tradition and council-established orthodoxy; it had grown into a highly variegated, inwardly and outwardly engaged set of philosophical positions. These schools took it upon themselves not merely to represent Buddhist teaching or make the benefits of its practice available, but also to explain Buddhism, to make it not only a reasonable philosophical discourse, but the most supremely reasonable of them all. The ultimate goal of life, liberation from rebirth, though in general shared by all soteriologies in Brahmanism, Jainism and Buddhism, was represented uniquely by Buddhists as the pacification of all psychological attachments through the extinguishing (nirvana) of desires, which would lead to a consequent extinguishing of karma and the prevention of rebirth. One particularly unique doctrine of Buddhism in its attempt to thematize these issues was the theory of no-self or no-soul (anatman) and what implications it carried. In the empirical sense, the idea of no-self meant that not only persons, but also what are normally considered the stable substances of nature are not in fact fixed and continuous, that everything from one's sense of personal identity to the forms of objects could be analyzed away, as it were, into the atomic parts which were their bases. In the ultimate metaphysical sense, it meant that no one, upon release from rebirth, will live eternally as a spiritual, self-conscious entity (atman), but that the series of births caused by inherited karma will simply terminate, reducing, as its cash-value, the total amount of suffering in the world. These theories prompted sharp and deep questions and criticisms, such as, "if the things and persons of the world are nothing more than atoms in constant flux, how can a person have an orderly experience of a world of apparent substances?", "if there is no enduring identity or self, who is it that practices Buddhism and is liberated?", and "how should we account for the differences between enlightened beings like the Buddha and unenlightened ones, like ourselves?" Answering such questions intelligibly for the inquiring minds of the philosophical community were a number of distinct schools which came collectively to be known as schools involved with the "analysis of elements" (abhidharma). Nagarjuna received his philosophical training in the texts, vocabulary and debates of the Abhidharmikas.

The two most prevalent schools of Abhidharma were the school of "Universal Existence" (Sarvastivada) and the "True Doctrine" school (Sautrantika). These schools held in common a theory of substantialism which served as an explanation to both worldly and ultimate metaphysical questions. This theory of substantialism, formulated in slightly different ways by each school, had two fundamental linchpins. The first was a theory of causality, or the strict necessity of one event following from another event. The theory of causal necessity was essential for all Buddhist thought, for Gautama Siddhartha himself had firmly asserted that all suffering or psychological pain had a distinct cause, namely attachment or desire (tanha), and the key to removing suffering from one's life and attaining the "tranquility of mind" or contentment (upeksa) of nirvana was to cut out its causal condition. Suffering was brought about by a definite cause, but that cause is contingent upon the human behaviors and practices of any given individual, and if attachment could be exorcized from these behaviors and practices, then the individual could live a life which would no longer experience impermanence and loss as painful, but accept the world for what it in fact is. Buddhist theory and practice had always been based on the notion that, not just psychological attachment, but all phenomena are causally interdependent, that all things and events which come to pass in the world arise out of a causal chain (pratityasamutpada). Buddhism is inconceivable without this causal theory, for it opens the door to the diagnosis and removal of suffering. For the Universal Existence and True Doctrine schools however, the second linchpin was a theory of fundamental elements, a theory which had to follow from any coherent causal theory. Causes, their philosophical exponents figured, are not merely arbitrary, but are regular and predictable, and their regularity must be due to the fact the things or phenomena have fixed natures of their own (svabhava), which determine and limit the kinds of causal powers they can and cannot exert on other things. Water, for example, can quench thirst and fire can burn other things, but water cannot cause a fire, just as fire cannot quench thirst. The pattern and limits of particular causal powers and their effects are therefore rooted in what kind of a thing a thing happens to be; its nature defines what it can and can't do to other things. Now in their theoretical models, causal efficacy was contained not in any whole, unified object, but rather in the parts, qualities and atomic elements of which any object happened to be constituted, so in their formulation, it was not fire which burnt but the heat produced by its fire molecules, and it was not water which quenched thirst but the correspondence of its molecules to the receptivity of molecules in the body. Indeed, fire in these systems was only fire because of its molecular qualities, and the same with water. But these qualities, molecules and elements had fixed natures, and thus could emit or receive certain causal powers and not others.

The basic difference between the Universal Existence and True Doctrine schools in their advocacy of both Buddhist causal and fundamental elements theories were their respective descriptions of how such causes operated. For the Universal Existence school, the effect of a cause was already inherent in the nature of the cause (satkaryavada). My thirst is quenched not by any fundamental change in my condition, but because the water that I drank had the power to quench my thirst, and this power does not rest in me, but in what I am trying to drink; this is why fire cannot quench thirst. Change here is only an apparent transformation already potential in the actors who are interrelating. For the True Doctrine school, on the other hand, any effect by definition must be a change in the condition of the receptor of the causal power, and as such, causal potential only becomes actual where it can effect a real change in something else (asatkaryavada). Again, using water as an illustration, the properties of water effect a change in the properties of my body, transforming my condition from a condition of thirst to one of having my thirst quenched. Change is change of what is effected, otherwise it would be silly to speak of change.

This seemingly abstract or inconsequential difference turns out in these two opposed systems however to be quite relevant, for the substantialist ideas of fixed nature and essence provide the basis not only for conceptualizing the material, empirical world, but also for conceiving the knowledge and attainment of ultimate reality. For just as only metaphysical analysis could distinguish between phenomena and their ultimate causal constituents, such analysis was also the only reliable guide for purifying experience of attachments. Those causes which lead to enmeshment in the worldly cycle of rebirth (samsara) cannot be the same as those which lead to peace (nirvana). These states of existence are just as different as fire and water, samsara will quench thirst just as little as nirvana will lead to the fires of passion. And so, it is the Buddha's words, for those who advocated the theory of the effect as pre-existent in the cause, which had the potential to purify consciousness, as opposed to the words of any unorthodox teacher; it was the practices of Buddhists, for those who championed the notion of external causal efficacy, which could liberate one from rebirth, and not the practices of those who perpetuated the ambitions of the everyday, workaday world. These schools were, each in their uniquely Buddhist turns, true exemplars of the age-old assumptions of the karma worldview in which a person is what he or she does, and what one does proceeds from what type of fundamental makeup one has inherited from previous lives of deeds, a worldview that is which intimately marries essence, existence and ethics. To be a Buddhist means precisely to distinguish between Buddhist and non-Buddhist acts, between ignorance and enlightenment, between the suffering world of samsara and the purified attainment of nirvana.

In his revolutionary tract of The Fundamental Verses on the Middle Way, Nagarjuna abjectly throws this elementary distinction between samsara and nirvana out the door, and does so in the very name of the Buddha. "There is not the slightest distinction," he declares in the work, "between samsara and nirvana. The limit of the one is the limit of the other." Now how can such a thing be posited, that is, the identity of samsara and nirvana, without totally undermining the theoretical basis and practical goals of Buddhism as such? For if there is no difference between the world of suffering and the attainment of peace, then what sort of work is a Buddhist to do as one who seeks to end suffering? Nagarjuna counters by reminding the Buddhist philosophers that, just as Gautama Sakyamuni had rejected both metaphysical and empirical substantialism through the teaching of "no-soul" (anatman) and causal interdependence (pratityasamputpada), so Scholastic Buddhism had to remain faithful to this non-substantialist stance through a rejection of the causal theories which necessitated notions of fixed nature (svabhava), theories which metaphysically reified the difference between samsara and nirvana. This later rejection could be based on Nagarjuna's newly coined notion of the "emptiness," "zeroness" or "voidness" (sunyata) of all things.

Recapitulating a logical analysis of the causal theories of the Universal Existence and True Doctrine schools, Nagarjuna rejects the premises of their theories. The basic claim these schools shared was that causal efficacy could only be accounted for through the fundamental nature of an object; fire caused the burning of objects because fire was made of fire elements and not water elements, the regularity and predictability of its causal powers consistent with its essential material basis. Reviving and logically sharpening the early Buddhist "four errors" (catuskoti) method, Nagarjuna attempts to dismantle this trenchant philosophical assumption. Contrary to the Scholastic Buddhist views, Nagarjuna finds that, were objects to have a stable, fixed essence, the changes brought about by causes would not be logically intelligible or materially possible. Let us say, along with the school of Universal Existence, that the effect pre-exists in the cause, or for example, that the burning of fire and the thirst-quenching of water are inherent in the kinds of substances fire and water are. But if the effects already exist in the cause, then it would be nonsensical to speak of effects in the first place, because in their interaction with other phenomena the pre-existent causes would not produce anything new, they would merely be manifesting the potential powers already exhibited. That is, if the potential to burn is conceived to exist within fire and the potential to quench thirst already inhered in water, then, Nagarjuna thinks, burning and thirst-quenching would be but appearances of the causal powers of fire and water substances, and this would make the notion of an effect, the production of a novel change, meaningless. If, on the other hand, we side with the True Doctrine school in supposing that the effect does not pre-exist in the cause, but is a novel change in the world, then the category of substance breaks down. Why? Because if fire and water are stable substances which possess fixed natures or essences, then what sort of relation could they bear to other objects which have entirely different fixed natures? How could fire be thought to effect a human being when the latter possesses a nature and thus takes on a form that is entirely dissimilar to fire? For the person to be effected by fire, his nature would have to change, would have to be destructible, and this vitiates the supposition that the person's nature is fixed. Stable, fixed essences (svabhava) which are conceived to be entirely heterogeneous could have no way of relating without their initially supposed fixed essences being compromised. The conclusion is that neither of these two proffered substantialist Buddhist explanations of causal efficacy can survive logical examination.

We may be tempted, faced with these failures, to adopt alternative theories of causality advocated outside the Buddhist tradition in order to save the intelligibility of substance. We may suppose, along with Jaina philosophers, the effects somehow proceed both from inherent powers of substances as well as the vulnerabilities of objects with which these substances interact. This obviously will not do for Nagarjuna the logician, for it would be tantamount to suggesting that things and events arise or come about due both to their own causal powers and as effected by other things, that event A, such as burning or thirst-quenching is caused both by itself and by other things. This violates the law of excluded middle outright, since a thing cannot be characterized by both A and not-A, and so will not serve as an explanation. Exhausted by the search for a viable substantialist principle of causality, we may wish to opt for the completely anti-metaphysical stance of the Indian Materialist school, which denies both that events are brought about through the inherent causal powers of their relata and are caused by extraneous powers. This thorough denial would have us believe that no cause-and-effect relationship exists between phenomena, and Buddhists may not resort to this conclusion because it militates against the basic teachings of the Buddha that all empirical phenomena arise out of interdependence. This was the teaching of the Buddha himself, and so no Buddhist can allow that events are not caused.

What are we to draw from all this abstract logical critique? Are we to infer that Nagarjuna's philosophy boils down to some strange paradoxical mysticism in which there is some ambiguous sense in which things should be considered causally interdependent but interdependent in some utterly unexplainable and inscrutable way? Not at all! Nagarjuna has not refuted all available theories of cause and effect, he has only rejected all substantialist theories of cause and effect. He thinks he has shown that, if we maintain the philosophical assumption that things in the world derive from some unique material and essential basis, then we shall come away empty-handed in a search to explain how things could possibly relate to one another, and so would have no way of describing how changes happen. But since both our eminently common sense and the words of the Buddha affirm unremittingly that changes do indeed happen, and happen constantly, we must assume that they happen somehow, through some other fact or circumstance of existence. For his own part, Nagarjuna concludes that, since things do not arise because phenomena relate through fixed essences, then they must arise because phenomena lack fixed essences. Phenomena are malleable, they are susceptible to alteration, addition and destruction. This lack of fixed nature (nihsvabhava), this alterability of things then means that their physical and empirical forms are built not upon essence, as both the Universal Existence and True Doctrine schools posit, but upon the fact that nothing (sunya) ever defines and characterizes them eternally and unconditionally. It is not that things are in themselves nothing, nor that things possess a positive absence (abhava) of essence. Change is possible because a radical indeterminancy (sunyata) permeates all forms. Burning happens because conditions can arise where temperatures become incindiary and singe flesh, just as thirst can be quenched when the process of ingestion transforms water into body. Beings relate to one another not because of their heterogeneous forms, but because their interaction makes them susceptible to ongoing transformation.

The Fundamental Verses on the Middle Way is a tour de force through the entire categorical system of the Buddhist metaphysical analysis (abhidharma) which had given birth to its scholastic movements. Nagarjuna attacks all the concepts of these traditions which were thematized according to substantialist, essentialist metaphysics, using at every turn the logically revised "four errors" method. But perhaps most revolutionary was Nagarjuna's extension of this doctrine of the "emptiness" of all phenomena to the discussion of the relationship between the Buddha and the world, between the cycle of pain-inflicted rebirth (samsara) and contented, desire-less freedom (nirvana). The Buddha, colloquially known as "the one who came and went" (Tathagata), cannot properly be thought of for Nagarjuna in the way the Buddhist scholastics have, that is, as the eternally pure seed of the true teachings of peace which puts to rest the delusions of the otherwise defiled world. The name and person of "Buddha" should not serve as the theoretical basis and justification of distinguishing between the ordinary, ignorant world and perfected enlightenment. After all, Nagarjuna reminds his readers, all change in the world, including the transformations which lead to enlightenment, are only possible because of interdependent causality (pratityasamutpada), and interdependent causality in turn is only possible because things, phenomena, lack any fixed nature and so are open (sunya) to being transformed. The Buddha himself was only transformed because of interdependence and emptiness, and so, Nagarjuna infers, "the nature of Tathagata is the very nature of the world/" It stands to reason then that no essential delimitations can be made between the world of suffering and the practices which can lead to peace, for both are merely alternative outcomes in the nexus of worldly interdependence. The words and labels which attach to both the world and the experience of nirvana are not the means of separating the wheat of life from its chaff, nor true cultivators of the soil of experience from the over-ambitious "everyday" rabble. Rather, samsara and nirvana signify nothing but the lack of guarantees in a life of desire and the possibility of change and hope. "We assert," Nagarjuna proffers to say on behalf of the Buddhists, "that whatever arises dependently is as such empty. This manner of designating things is exactly the middle path." A Buddhist oath to avoid suffering cannot be taken as a denunciation of the world, but only as a commitment to harness the possibilities which already are entailed within it for peace. Talk about the Buddha and practices inspired by the Buddha are not tantamount to the raising of a religious or ideological flag which marks off one country from another; rather, the world of suffering and the world of peace have the same extension and boundary, and talk about suffering and the Buddha is only there to make us aware of the possibilities of the world, and how our realization of these possibilities depends precisely on what we do and how we interact.

4. Against Proof

The apparently anti-theoretical stance occupied by Nagarjuna did not win him many philosophical friends either among his contemporary Buddhist readers or the circles of Brahminical thought. While it was certainly the case that, over the next seven centuries of Buddhist scholastic thought, the concept of emptiness was more forcefully articlulated, it was also hermeneutically appropriated into other systems in ways of which Nagarjuna would not necessarily have approved. Sunyata was soon made to carry theoretical meanings unrelated to causal theory in various Buddhists sects, serving as the support of a philosophy of consciousness for the later illustrious Vijnanavada or Cognition School and as the explication of the nature of both epistemology and ontology in the precise school of Buddhist Logic (Yogacara-Sautrantika). These schools, deriding Nagarjuna's skepticism, retained their commitment to a style of philosophizing in India which allowed intellectual stands to be taken only on the basis of commitments to thesis, counter-thesis, rules of argument and standards of proof, that is, schools which equated philosophical reflection with competing doctrines of knowledge and metaphysics. This is all the more ironic given the overt attempt Nagarjuna made to head off the possibility that the idea of emptiness would be refuted or co-opted by this style of philosophizing, an attempt still preserved in the pages of his work The End of Disputes (Vigrahavyavartani).

The End of Disputes was in large measure a reactionary work, written only when philosophical objections were brought against Nagarjuna's non-essentialist, anti-metaphysical approach to philosophy. The work was addressed to a relatively new school of Brahminical thought, the school of Logic (Nyaya) Philosophical debate, conducted in formalized fashions in generally court settings, had persisted in India for perhaps as much as eight hundred years before the time of the first literary systematizer of the school of logic, Gautama Aksapada. Several attempts had been made by Buddhist and Jaina schools before Nyaya to compose handbooks for formal debate. But Nyaya brought to the Indian philosophical scene a full-blown doctrine not only of the rules and etiquette of the debate process, but also an entire system of inference which distinguished between logically acceptable and unacceptable forms of argument. Finally, undergirding all forms of valid argument was a system of epistemology, a theory of proof (pramanasastra), which distinguished between various kinds of mental events which could be considered truth-revealing, or corresponding to real states of affairs and those which could not be relied upon as mediators of objective reality. Direct sensory perception, valid logical argument, tenable analogy and authoritative testimony were held by the Logicians to be the only kinds of cognitions which could correspond to real things or events in the world. They could serve as proofs to the claims we make to know. With some modifications, the approach of Nyaya came to be accepted as philosophical "first principles" by almost all the other schools of thought in India for centuries, both Vedic and non-Vedic. Indeed, in many philosophical quarters, before entering into the subtleties and agonism of advanced philosophical debate, a student was expected to pass through the prerequisites of studying Sanskrit grammar and logic. All thought, and so all positive sciences, from agriculture to Vedic study to statecraft, were at times even said to be fundamentally based on and entirely specious without basic training in "critical analysis" (anviksiki), which, according to Gautama Aksapada, was precisely what Nyaya was.

The Logicians, upon becoming aware very early of Nagarjuna's thought, brought against his position of emptiness (sunyata) a sharp criticism. Certainly no claim, they insisted, should compel us to give it assent unless it can be known to be true. Now Nagarjuna has told us that emptiness is the lack of a fixed, essential nature which all things exhibit. But if all things are empty of a fixed nature, then that would include, would it not, Nagarjuna's own claim that all things are empty? For one to say that all things lack a fixed nature would be also to say that no assertion, no thesis like Nagarjuna's that all things are empty, could claim hold on a fixed reference. And if such a basic and all-encompassing thesis must admit of having itself neither a fixed meaning nor reference, then why should we believe it? Does not rather the thesis "all things lack a fixed essence, and are thus empty," since it is a universal quantifier and so covers all things including theses, refute itself? The Logicians are not so much making the claim here that skepticism necessarily opts out of its own position, as when a person in saying "I know nothing" witnesses unwittingly to at least a knowledge of two things, namely how to use language and his own ignorance, as in the cases of the Socratic Irony and the Liar's Paradox. It is more the direct charge that a philosophy which refuses to admit universal essences must be flatly self-contradictory, since a universal denial must itself be essentially true of all things. Should we not consider Nagarjuna as a person who, setting out on what would otherwise be an ingenious and promising philosophical journey, in a bit too much of a rush, tripped over his own feet on his way out the front door?

Nagarjuna, in The End of Disputes, responds in two ways. The first is an attempt to show the haughty Logicians that, if they really critically examine this fundamental concept of proof which grounds their theory of knowledge, they will find themselves in no better position than they claim Nagarjuna is in. How, Nagarjuna asks in an extended argument, can anything be proven to a fixed certainty in the way the Naiyayikas posit? When you get right down to it, a putative fact can be proven in only two ways; it is either self-evident or it is shown to be true by something else, by some other fact or piece of knowledge already assumed to be true. But if we assent to the very rules of logic and valid argument the Vedic Logicians espouse, we shall find, Nagarjuna thinks, that both of these suppositions are flawed. Let us take the claim that something can be proven to be true on the basis of other facts known to be true. Suppose, to use a favorite example from the Logician Gautama, I want to know how much an object weighs. I put it on a scale to measure its weight. The scale gives me a result, and for a moment that satisfies me; I can rely on the measurement because scales can measure weight. But hold on, Nagarjuna flags, your reliance on the trustworthiness of the scale is itself an assumption, not a piece of knowledge. Shouldn't the scale be tested too? I measure the object on a second scale to test the accuracy of the first scale, and the measurement agrees with the first scale. But how can I just assume, once again, that the second scale is accurate? Both scales might be wrong. And the exercise goes on, there is nothing in principle which would justify me in assuming that any one test I use to verify a piece of knowledge is itself reliable beyond doubt. So, Nagarjuna concludes, the supposition that something can be proven through reference to some other putative fact runs into the problem that the series of proofs will never reach an end, and leaves us with an infinite regress. Should we commit ourselves to the opposite justification and propound that we know things to be true which are self-evident, then Nagarjuna would counter that we would be making a vacuous claim. The whole point of epistemology is to discover reliable methods of knowing, which implies that on the side of the world there are facts and on the side of the knower there are proofs which make those facts transparent to human consciousness. Were things just self-evident, proof would be superfluous, we should just know straightaway whether something is such and such or not. The claim of self-evidence destroys, in an ironic fashion which always pleased Nagarjuna, the very need for a theory of knowledge!

Having tested both criteria of evidence and come up short, the Logician might, and in fact historically did, try an alternative theory of mutual corroboration. We may not know for certain that a block of stone weighs too much to fit into a temple I am building, and we may not be certain that the scale being used to measure the stones is one hundred percent accurate, but if as a result of testing the stones with the scale I put the stones in the building and find that they work well, I have reason to rely on the knowledge I gain through the mutual corroborations of measurement and practical success. This process, for Nagarjuna, however, should not pass for an epistemologist who claims to be as strict as the Brahminical Logicians. In fact, this process should not even be considered mutual corroboration; it is actually circular. I assume stones have a certain measurable mass, so I design an instrument to confirm my assumption, and I assume scales measure weight so I assess objects by them, but in terms of strict logic, I am only assuming that this corroborative process proves my suppositions, but it in fact does nothing more than feed my preconceived assumptions rather than give me information about the nature of objects. We may say that a certain person is a son because he has a father, Nagarjuna quips, and we may say another person is a father because he has a son, but apart from this mutual definition, how do we know which particular person is which? By extension, Nagarjuna claims, this is the problem with the project of building a theory of knowledge as such. Epistemology and ontology are parasitic on one another. Epistemologies are conveniently formulated to justify preferred views of the world, and ontologies are presumed to be justified through systematic theories of proof, but apart from these projects being mutually theoretically necessary, we really have no honest way of knowing whether they in fact lend credence to our beliefs. Again, Nagarjuna has used tools from the bag of the logician, in this case, standard argumentational fallacies, to show that it is Brahminical Logic, and not his philosophy of emptiness, which has tripped itself up before having a chance to make a run in the world.

This, as said above, was Nagarjuna's first response to the Logicians' accusation that a philosophy of emptiness is fundamentally incoherent. There is however, Nagarjuna famously asserts, another pettito principii in the Nyaya charge that the thesis "all things are empty and lack a fixed nature" is incoherent. The statement "all things are empty" is actually, Nagarjuna says, not a formal philosophical thesis in the first place! According to the Nyaya rules of viable logical argument, the first step in proving an assertion true is the declared statement of the putative fact as a thesis in the argument (pratijna). Now in order for something to qualify as a formal philosophical thesis, a statement must be a fact about a particular object or state of knowable affairs in the world, and it is a matter of doctrine for Nyaya that all particular objects or states of affairs are classifiable into their categories of substances, qualities, and activities. Nagarjuna however does not buy into this set of ontological categories in the first place, and so the Logician is being disingenuous in trying to covertly pull him into the ontological game with this charge that the idea of emptiness is metaphysically unintelligible. The Brahminical Logician is insisting that no person can engage in a philosophical discussion without buying, at least minimally, into a theory of essences and issues surrounding how to categorize essences. It is exactly this very point, Nagarjuna demurs, that is eminently debatable! But since the Logician will not pay Nagarjuna the courtesy of discussion on Nagarjuna's terms, the Buddhist replies to them on their terms: "If my statement (about emptiness) were a philosophical thesis, then it would indeed be flawed; but I assert no thesis, and so the flaw is not mine."

With the exception of his two major commentators four centuries later, this stance of Nagarjuna satisfied no one in the Indian philosophical tradition, neither Brahmanas nor fellow Buddhists. It was the stance of the kind of debater who styled himself a vaitandika, a person who refutes rival philosophical positions while advocating no thesis themselves. Despite all their other disagreements, Brahmanas and Buddhists in following centuries did not consider such a stance to be truly philosophical, for while a person who occupied it may be able to expose dubious theories, one could never hope to learn the truth about the world and life from them. Such a person, it was suspected is more likely a charlatan than a sage. Despite the title of his work then, Nagarjuna's attempt to call into "first question" theories of proof fell far short of ending all disputes. However, Nagarjuna closes this controversial and much-discussed work by reminding his readers of who he is. Paying reverence to the Buddha, the teacher, he says, of interdependent causality and emptiness, Nagarjuna tells his audience that "nothing will prevail for those in whom emptiness will not prevail, while everything will prevail for whom emptiness prevails." This is a reiteration of Nagarjuna's commitment that theory and praxis are not a partnership in which only through the former's justification is the latter redeemed. The goal of practice is after all transformation, not fixity, and so if one insists on marrying philosophy to practice, philosophical reflection cannot be beholden to the unchanging, eternal essences of customary epistemology and metaphysics

5. The New Buddhist Space and Mission

There may be some extent to which the age-old debate as to whether Nagarjuna was a devotee of the traditional Theravada or Classical Buddhism or the Mahayana (Great Vehicle) sect turns on the authorship of the two letters attributed to him. Very little can be gleaned from the other works in Nagarjuna's philosophical corpus that would lend much support to the supposition that the second-century scholar was even much aware of Great Vehicle doctrines or personages, even though the ground-breaking notion of emptiness was the one which Mahayana fixed on as its central idea. The two "ethical epistles" addressed to the historical Satvahana liege Gautamiputra Satkarni (r. ca. 166-196) would certainly give Nagarjuna a plausible historical locus. With their abundant references to the supremacy of the Great Vehicle teachings, they would also depict Nagarjuna as unequivocally within this movement. However, the non-existence of original Sanskrit versions of the Suhrllekha (To a Good Friend) and Ratnavali (Precious Garland), as well as their obviously heavy redactions in the Tibetan and Chinese editions, make any definitely reliable attribution of them to Nagarjuna practically impossible.

The familiar distinctions between the Classical and Great Vehicles are well-worn; the conservative scriptural and historical literalism of the former pitted against the mythological revisionism of the latter, the idealization of the reclusive ascetic pursuing his own perfection in the former as opposed to the angelic and socially engaged bodhisattva of the latter. Nagarjuna's other works are filled with honorific passages dedicated only to the Buddha himself, while the two epistles abound in praise of the virtues of angelic bodhisattva-hood, though even these are found amidst passages extolling the perfections of the eightfold path and the nobility of the four truths. Whatever Nagarjuna's precise sectarian identification, he never loses sight of the understanding that the practice of Buddhism is a new sort of human vehicle, a vehicle meant not to carry people from one realm to another realm, but a vehicle which could make people anew in the only realm where they have always lived.

Nagarjuna's letters to the war-mongering Gautamiputra are somewhat conspicuous for the relative paucity of advice on the actual art of statecraft. Long sermons in To a Good Friend on the correct interpretation of subtle Mahayana teachings are intermingled with catechism-like presentations of the excellence of monastic virtues, and these are so numerous that even the author concedes toward the end of the correspondence that the king should keep as many of the enumerated precepts as he can, since keeping all of them would tax the fortitude of the most seasoned monk. But with all of these somewhat disconnected sections of the letter which even internally are wont to jump from one topic to another, a motif emerges which does seem to cohere with the more thematic approaches to the idea of emptiness in the other works, and that motif is the primacy of virtuous conduct and practice, which takes on even a higher and more relevant role than the achievements of wisdom.

This motif is surely significant, given the fact that the Classical and Great Vehicles, while both submitting that ultimate wisdom (prajna) and compassion (karuna) were the two paramount virtues, argued over which one was highest, the Theravada opting for wisdom and Mahayana for compassion. In these epistles, while Nagarjuna warns that the intentions behind moral acts must be informed by wisdom lest the benefits of the deed be spoiled, he stresses repeatedly the importance of steadfastly ethical conduct. Dharma or behavior upright in the eyes of the Buddha's law of existence has two aspects, one which is characterized by meditative non-action and the other through positive action, and the road to Buddhahood, he says, passes through the positive action of the bodhisattva. For even though dharma is subtle and hard to comprehend, particularly where the notion of emptiness is involved and so easily misunderstood, its practice through the cultivation of moral intentions and attitudes will lead unerringly through the tangle of doctrinal debates. Beyond this general advice, which would apply to any monk or nun, counsel is given to the king that dharma as positive ethical conduct is also "the best policy," for when one socially promotes adherence to ethical conduct, justice will prevail in the kingdom and benefits will accrue to all, benefits which rivals will envy beyond any transient material wealth and false senses of power.

In the worlds of the present and the future, it is after all only actions which matter. It is indeed the very physicality of deeds which leads to the accumulation of either meritorious or detrimental karma, and so one's fate lies squarely in ones own hands. But through acts performed in the field of samsara, all conceivable changes are possible. A prince can become a pauper, either willingly, like the Buddha, or unwillingly. Young men become old, beauty morphs into decrepitude, friendship descends into enmity. It is this piercing contingency of samsara which is so often experienced with such anguish. But, Nagarjuna quickly reminds his readers, all these transformations can just as easily go in the opposite direction, with material poverty blossoming into spiritual riches, fathers reborn as sons and mothers as young wives, and the wounds of conflict sutured with the threads of reconciliation. Interdependent causality and the emptiness which change depends on mean that things can always go either way, and so which way they in fact go depends intimately on one's own deeds. And this leads one to grasp that the proper site of practice for the Buddhist cannot be just the monastery, removed as it tries to be from the machinations of state, economy, social class and the other tumultuous and sundry affairs of suffering beings. As there is no difference between samsara and nirvana owing to the emptiness and constantly changing nature of both, so the change which a Buddhist effects upon herself and those around her is a change in the world, and this constant and purposeful change is the rightful mission of Buddhism. With his own peculiar and visionary interpretation of the concept of the emptiness of all things then, Nagarjuna has woven an anti-metaphysical and epistemological stance together with an ethics of action which was, true to its own implications, to transform the self-understanding of the Buddhist tradition for millennia to come.

6. References and Further Reading

Nagarjuna's Works Addressed to Buddhists

  • Mulamadhyamakakarika, (Fundamental Verses on the Middle Way) translated as The Philosophy of the Middle Way by David J. Kalapuhana, SUNY Press, Albany, 1986.
  • Sunyatasaptati, (Seventy Verses on Emptiness) translated by Cristian Lindtner, Nagarjuniana: Studies in the Writings and Philosophy of Nagarjuna, Akademisk Forlag, Copenhagen, 1987, 35-69.
  • Yuktisastika, (Sixty Verses on Reasoning) translated by Christian Lindtner, Nagarjuniana: Studies in the Writings and Philosophy of Nagarjuna, Akademisk Forlag, Copenhagen, 1987, 103-19.
  • Pratityasamutpadahrdaya, (The Constituents of Dependent Arising) translated by L. Jamspal and Peter Della Santina in Journal of the Department of Buddhist Studies, University of Delhi, 2:1, 1974, 29-32.
  • Bodhisambharaka, (Preparation for Enlightenment) translated by Christian Lindtner, Nagarjuniana: Studies in the Writings and Philosophy of Nagarjuna, Akademisk Forlag, Copenhagen, 1987, 228-48.

Nagarjuna's Works Addressed to Brahminical Systems

  • Vigrahavyavartani, (The End of Disputes) translated as The Dialectical Method of Nagarjuna by Kamaleswar Bhattacharya, Motilal Banarsidass, Delhi, 1978.
  • Vaidalyaprakarana, (Pulverizing the Categories) translated as Madhyamika Dialectics by Ole Holten Pind, Akademisk Forlag, Copenhagen, 1987.

Nagarjuna's Ethical Epistles

  • Suhrllekha, (To a Good Friend) translated as Nagarjuna's Letter to King Gautamiputra by L. Jamspal, N.S. Chophel and Peter Della Santina, Motilal Banarsidass, Delhi, 1978.
  • Ratnavali, (Precious Garland) translated as The Precious Garland and the Song of the Four Mindfulnesses by Jeffrey Hopkins, Lati Rimpoche and Anne Klein, Vikas Publishing, Delhi, 1975.

Author Information

Douglas Berger
Southern Illinois University
U. S. A.

Jean-Luc Nancy (1940—)

nancyThe French philosopher Jean-Luc Nancy  has written more than twenty books and hundreds of texts or contributions to volumes, catalogues and journals. His philosophical scope is very broad: from On Kawara to Heidegger, from the sense of the world and the deconstruction of Christianity to the Jena romantics of the Schlegel brothers.

Nancy is influenced by philosophers like Jacques Derrida, Georges Bataille and Martin Heidegger. He became famous with La communauté désoeuvrée (translated as The Inoperative Community in 1991), at the same time a work on the question of community and a comment on Bataille. He has also published books on Heidegger, Kant, Hegel and Descartes. One of the main themes in his work is the question of our being together in contemporary society. In Être singulier pluriel (translated as Being Singular Plural in 2000) Nancy deals with the question how we can still speak of a 'we' or of a plurality, without transforming this 'we' into a substantial and exclusive identity. What are the conditions to speak of a 'we' today?

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Lacan
  3. Deconstruction
  4. Community
    1. Immanentism
    2. Heidegger and being-with
  5. Ontology
    1. Globalization
    2. Deconstructing Christianity
  6. Sovereignty
  7. Art and Culture
  8. References and Further Reading

1. Biography

Jean-Luc Nancy was born on the 26th of July 1940 in Caudéran, near Bordeaux in France. When exactly the philosopher Nancy emerged is difficult to ascertain, but it is clear that his first philosophical interests began to arise during his youth in the catholic environment of Bergerac. Shortly after he obtained his graduate in philosophy in 1962 in Paris, Nancy began to write explicitly philosophical texts. He published on authors like Karl Marx, Immanuel Kant, Friedrich Nietzsche and André Breton. This engagement with various different types of thinkers also came to be characteristic of his later work, which is renowned for its versatility.

After his aggregate in philosophy in Paris and a short period as a teacher in Colmar, in 1968 Nancy became an a assistant at the Institut de Philosophie in Strasbourg—he lives and works in Strasbourg. In 1973, he obtained his Phd under the supervision of Paul Ricoeur, via a dissertation on Kant. Soon after, he became the 'maître de conférences' at the Université des Sciences Humaines in Strasbourg, the institute to which he is still attached. In 1987, Nancy was elected docteur d'état (doctor of state) in Toulouse with the congratulations of the jury. His dissertation handled the topic of freedom in the work of Kant, Schelling and Heidegger, and was published as L'expérience de la liberté (translated as The Experience of Freedom) in 1988. His supervisor was Gérard Granel and members of the jury included Jacques Derrida and Jean-François Lyotard.

However, Nancy didn't wait until 1987 to extend his academic career. In the seventies and eighties he was a guest professor at the most diverse universities, from the Freie Universität in Berlin to the University of California. As a professor in philosophy, he was also involved in many cultural delegations of the French ministry of external affairs, particularly in relation to Eastern Europe, Great Britain and the United States of America. Together with his ever-growing publication list, this began to procure Nancy an international reputation. The quick translation of his work into several languages enhanced his fame (Nancy mastered, besides his mother tongue, also German, Italian and English).

This hyperactivity suddenly came to an end when he became gravely ill at the end of the eighties. He was forced to undergo a heart transplant (which Derrida talks about in his recently released book on Nancy, Le Toucher) and his recovery from this was inhibited by a long-term fight with cancer. These diseases marked his career fundamentally. Out of sheer necessity, he put an end to all of his courses at the beginning of the nineties and quit his membership of almost all of the committees that he participated in. He has recently restarted most of his activities, but it is surprising that during these troubles Nancy never stopped writing and publishing. A lot of his main works, most of which are related to social and political philosophical topics, were published in the nineties and he even wrote a text on his disease. It was published as a book in 2000 with the title L'intrus: the intruder. For the moment, now over sixty, he is a very active philosopher. He travels around the world as a popular speaker and thinker on many philosophical congresses and writes one text after another. Nancy is more alive than ever, both as a man and as a philosopher.

2. Lacan

Nancy's first book appears in 1973: Le titre de la lettre (The Title of the Letter). He wrote it with his philosophical partner Philippe Lacoue-Labarthe. Up until now, it has frequently been described as a critical study on the work of the French psychoanalyst Jacques Lacan. Without working this through here, it is worth mentioning that Nancy quite consistently refers to Lacan, or to psychoanalysis in general, and most of the time in quite a critical way. In The Sense of the World he describes the Lacanian notion of the 'Other' as a 'theological excrement'. That, in a nutshell, is what he had already said in The Title of the Letter: Nancy argues that Lacan questions the metaphysical subject, but does this in a metaphysical way. Since then, Nancy has continued to formulate his reservations against psychoanalytic concepts like Law, Father, Other, Subject, etc. While he contends that psychoanalytic jargon still bears some theological remnants, Nancy also thinks that a lot of its concepts are worth thinking through.

3. Deconstruction

Nevertheless, Lacan is not the author that Nancy and Lacoue-Labarthe explicitly study or look up to. It is the other Jacques, Jacques Derrida, who makes an enormous impression on both of them. With Derrida, Nancy affirms in several interviews, he had the impression that, after Sartre, something new and very contemporary was born in philosophy. Derrida's work inspired both Nancy and Lacoue-Labarthe to such a degree that they organise the famous conference in 1980, Les fins de l'homme, in Cerisy-la-Salle on Derrida and politics. This conference helped to consolidate Derrida's solid place at the pinnacle of contemporary philosophy.

For Nancy and Lacoue-Labarthe, this conference on Derrida and politics served as the starting point to deal with more politics. In the same year, they set up a philosophical platform to investigate the political. The 'Centre de recherches philosophiques sur le politique' (The Centre of Philosophical Research of the Political) started from the demand to rethink the political and not to rest on the blinding rhetoric of our current democracy. Over several years, philosophers such as Claude Lefort and Jean-François Lyotard give lectures on this topic, and out of this two books sprang up: Rejouer le politique (1981) and Le retrait du politique (translated as Retreating the Political in 1997).

In 1984, Nancy and Lacoue-Labarthe put an end to the activities of the Centre, because, according to them, its role as a place of encounter 'had become almost completely dissociated from that as a place of research and questioning'. The Centre had too often been the mere successive reception of speakers, rather than a common space with common concerns. Despite the closing down of the Centre in 1984, Nancy's concern with the question of the political, and that of community, has never disappeared.

Nancy is, of course, much more than a pupil of Derrida. His work is from the beginning marked by lots of diverse influences, from Georges Bataille and Maurice Blanchot to Descartes, Hegel, Kant, Nietzsche and Heidegger. These authors are already evident in the very first books that Nancy published: Le discours de la syncope (1976) and L'impératif catégorique (1983) on Kant, La remarque spéculative (translated as The Speculative Remark, 2001) on Hegel, Ego sum (1979) on Descartes and Le partage des voix (1982) on Heidegger.

The book that Nancy became famous with is La communauté désoeuvrée (1982), a comment on the work of Bataille. This text led Maurice Blanchot to discuss the question of community, and also to consider Nancy's comments on Bataille, in his La communauté inavouable (translated as The Unavowable Community in 1988). Later on, a compilation of essays centring around the theme of community, La communauté désoeuvrée, is also published as a book. Besides offering an excellent analysis of the problem of community, this volume is an interesting introduction to the author Nancy. One can learn to read Nancy in it, and this is not always an easy job because he starts mostly from a commentary on the work of other authors and develops his own thesis out of this commentary. This strategy of reading and thinking is named deconstruction and Nancy continues Derrida's work with it. This is one reason why one can call La communauté désoeuvrée a key text in Nancy's work.

Besides revealing his strategy of thinking, in this text one can also discover the main philosophical themes that Nancy is concerned with in his later work. These often circle around social and political philosophical problems, like the question how to develop our modern society with the twentieth century knowledge that political projects that start by trying to build society according to a well-defined shape or plan have frequently led to political terror and social violence. In this respect, Nancy is obviously thinking of the former socialist states, as well as the nazi and fascist states of the twentieth century.

When Nancy, in the footsteps of Derrida, deconstructs texts of an author, he researches in the most meticulous way what the author writes, but also and especially, what he or she doesn't write, where his or her thinking halts or recoils to think a problem through. He looks for the place where thinking stumbles. Out of this slip, Nancy tries to make clear the next step the author wanted to take/should have taken in order to think his or her problem but nevertheless didn't.

4. Community

In La communauté désoeuvrée, Nancy applies this deconstruction to the cry for the restoration of a transparent, small-scale community, a 'Gemeinschaft' that might liberate us from the 'alienation' in modern society, the 'Gesellschaft'. Nancy's thesis is that at the core of western political thinking, there is a longing for an 'original community'. It is the longing for an immediate being together, out of the idea that we once lived in a harmonious and intimate community, but that this harmony has declined throughout history. The modern society, the Gesellschaft, stands for the opposite of the warm and cosy pre-modern community, the Gemeinschaft. According to this line of thinking, we live now in an anonymous society full of selfish individuals and the close communal ties are no more than memories. This leads not only to the disintegration of society, but also to violence, the decline of norms and values, and so forth. The only solution to fight disintegration is to turn back to the period where the communal ties were present, or to strive for a future community where the former ties are restored.

This historic-philosophical scheme is not only used by a large number of philosophers or social and political thinkers, it is also a central theme within western society and culture in general. According to Nancy:

The lost or broken community can be exemplified in all kinds of ways and by all kinds of paradigms: the natural family, the Athenian city, the Roman Republic, the first Christian community, corporations, communes, or brotherhoods—always it is a matter of a lost age in which community was tight and bound to harmonious bonds in which above all it played back to itself, through its institutions, its rituals, and its symbols, the representation, indeed the living offering, of its own immanent unity, intimacy and autonomy' (The Inoperative Community, p. 9).

Nancy is thinking largely of the period of the German romantics, of Jean-Jacques Rousseau who left us a mythical natural community as a counterpoint to modern society, but the target of his analysis is also of contemporary communitarianisms, like Alasdair MacIntyre, who speak of the need for a return to pre-modern communities. The nostalgic thought that the past or the old days were better, that we have lost something that was present in the past, is a recognizable paradigm within our everyday life. This nostalgia is not only present in the programs of conservative political parties. A quick look at the commercials from various mediums (especially television) shows us that a lot of products are pretending to give us back a 'natural' biological condition of hair colour, for example. Also, in everyday life, people consistently voice their frustrations with the 'lawless and wild youths' who have alienated themselves from the community that they were born in.

It is, of course, remarkable that every generation seems to go back to the same criticism again and again. Therefore, Nancy says, the longing for an original community is not a reference to a real period in our history. It is rather a mythical thought, an imaginary picture of our past. As such, this nostalgic imagination is innocent, but when it becomes the starting point for a politics of community, the innocence disappears. We should become suspicious, Nancy says, of the retrospective consciousness of the lost community and its identity:

'whether this consciousness conceives of itself as effectively retrospective or whether, disregarding the realities of the past, it constructs images of this past for the sake of an ideal or prospective vision. We should be suspicious of this consciousness first of all because it seems to have accompanied the Western world from its very beginnings: at every moment in history, the Occident has rendered itself to the nostalgia for a more archaic community that has disappeared, and to deploring a loss of familiarity, fraternity and conviviality. Our history begins with the departure of Ulysses and with the onset of rivalry, dissension, and conspiracy in his palace. Around Penelope, who reweaves the fabric of intimacy without ever managing to complete it, pretenders set up the warring and political scene of society—pure exteriority' (The Inoperative Community, p. 10).

Let us take a contemporary example. The harmonic community of which MacIntyre speaks, is a community of common norms and values, shared by people with the same identity and background, otherwise the community wouldn't be harmonic anymore. If we take this moral inclination for a community of people with the same identity as a political longing, one is not that far removed from the logic of many nationalisms that are still present in Western Europe today. Of course, the intentions are manifestly different but the international political scene shows that the longing for a pure social identity can still lead to violent conflicts. The Balkan wars of the nineties, which erupted one by one, are a sad example of that. Whatever the motives of these wars, the belonging to an ethnic group has been the criterion in making the difference between good and evil, between us and them, between authentic Serbs or real Croats and others. What was sought after was a pure and undivided social identity, no longer soiled by the stains of other blood.

In other and fortunately less violent contexts, it is a certain culture of shared values and norms which delivers the foundations for social identity. Flemish people are defined as different from Dutch people, although they are neighbours, speak the same language and have almost everything in common. Another example is the current 'migration problem': there is often a suspicion on behalf of citizens around the world that the values of groups of immigrants might threaten the identity of a region and thereby affect the social solidarity. The fear in Western Europe, and elsewhere, seems to be that any influx of foreigners might change public life so dramatically that our 'own' former identity would be in danger. Symbols like the headscarf of Muslim females, for example, play an important role in that debate and are at the basis of hot political discussions on the identity and the values of many European nations.

a. Immanentism

Nancy summarises the communal desire for a closed and undivided social identity with his concept of immanentism. The French word 'immanence' means to be fully present with oneself, to be closed upon oneself. In La communauté désoeuvrée, immanentism is the concept by which Nancy describes the horizon of our attitudes towards identity and community. He points at two examples. On the one hand, he is thinking of the way that communities, nations or ethnics try to protect their identity from the influences of others, so that they are united around their undivided selfhood, culture or values. On the other hand, immanentism is also present in the way that the former socialist regimes in Eastern Europe understood the communist form of constitution as the final destination of humanity. There too, you can discover a desire for the annihilation of social alienation and for an immediate and transparent being together. The ultimate goal of human acting is to reach the transparent communist way of life. Once that goal has been realised, the idea is that all alienation of the capitalist way of life would disappear and society would finally be harmoniously present with itself.

With its detailed articulation of this political and philosophical paradigm of thinking, intertwined with a commentary on Bataille, Nancy's La communauté désoeuvrée obtained international fame. Nevertheless, he never elaborated a theory of community, just like he has not done so with the other main themes from his work. Far more often, he launches a few theses, offers fragments and traces of thinking, which he then develops further in later texts. This fragmentary character of his work sometimes makes it difficult to come to grips with, but on the other hand, you get in every book or text a lot of new perspectives and stimulating insights on contemporary political, philosophical and ontological problems.

b. Heidegger and being-with

Besides his enduring preoccupation with the work of classic philosophers like Kant, Hegel and Nietzsche, Nancy's thought concentrates primarily on a reorientation of the work of Martin Heidegger, especially since his 'doctorat d'état' in 1987. Not that Nancy's work is just a comment on Heidegger. In The Experience of Freedom for example, Nancy's study of the notion of freedom within Heidegger’s work, is not only a discussion of Heidegger, but also of Kant, Schelling and Sartre. Nancy is looking for a sort of 'non-subjective' freedom, a concept of freedom that tries to think the existential ground from which every freedom (thought as a property of the individual or a collectivity) starts from. Freedom, instead of being seen as the classical 'liberum arbitrium' or the subjectivistic free will, lies in the being thrown into the world, and into existence. As Heidegger does, Nancy accentuates the fact that freedom in Kant’s work is a sort of unconditional causality. In 'the second analogy of the experience' of the Kritik der reinen Vernunft (The Critique of Pure Reason), Kant argues that the specific form of causality that human freedom is—the subject acts 'spontaneously'—means that the subject must withdraw itself out of time, to not be determined by empirical causality. Therefore, as in Heidegger’s Vom Wesen der menschlichen Freiheit, Nancy determines Kantian freedom as a autopositional freedom, the freedom of a subject who 'forgets' that it is always already thrown into existence, even before it can decide to be free. So, one has to think freedom from its existential ground, its finite being. As long as one thinks freedom as the property of an 'infinite' subject, every form of finite being will appear a kind of heteronomy, as a restraint of my freedom’. My freedom, says Nancy, does not end where that of the other starts, but the existence of the other is the necessary condition to be free. There is no freedom without the presupposition of our being-in-the-world, and of our being thrown into the existence. That is why Heidegger’s work is interesting, because he was the first to think the existential condition, the being of the freedom through.

Nancy's interest in Heidegger's work also has something to do with the question of community, the question of being-with (Mitsein) in Heidegger’s words. Especially in his book Être singulier pluriel (Being Singular Plural), written in 1996, Nancy focuses upon that. This book, together with Une pensée finie from 1990 and Le sens du monde from 1993, is one of the most important texts in Nancy's work during the nineties and of his work in general.

In Être singulier pluriel, Nancy deals with the question how we can still speak of a 'we' or of a plurality, without transforming this 'we' into a substantial and exclusive identity. What are the conditions to speak of a 'we' today? From Heidegger, Nancy learnt that our being in the world with others determines us, before we can speak of a division between and individual and a community. We are always already thrown into the world, but this contingent positioning can never be the basis to speak of a natural or original community. Contrary to Aristotle or Plato, we can no longer fall back on a fixed metaphysical or natural (phusis) ground. Neither is the world an entity created by God, wherein we occupy a well-defined place. The modern philosophical order, especially since Nietzsche, has finished with there 'truths'. Once community or being-together is no longer a 'natural' fact wherein I'm originally dwelling, community becomes a capital question for modern political philosophy. Also, in our time the problem of community is confronted with the further question: how to understand community when it is no longer given to us as a gift of God, or as a harmonic being-together and identification with our 'own' people?

To Nancy, Heidegger is the philosopher who handles this question in a quite ambiguous way and that makes him controversial, still today. Everyone who drops the name Heidegger in philosophical circles, knows of the controversy he still evokes. More than is the case with, for example, Maurice Blanchot, Heidegger's extreme right sympathies are still the cause of hot polemics, certainly when one, as Nancy does explicitly, touches the ethical and political terrains. Nancy does not deny this ambiguity. On the contrary, he takes it as the starting point of his reorientation of Heidegger. On the one hand, Nancy argues that Heidegger makes it clear, in the most radical way, that every human being (Dasein as he calls it) is always being opened unto a world. Being in the world is being with others, and this being-with is an essential trait—if one can still speak of essence; rather it is the unsubstantial essence, the being of every being-there. So, being-there is being-with, to exist is to coexist.

According to Nancy, there is no more radicalised point of view to think community in a modern, contingent way. We are always being-with, but this being-with is no longer a substantial being-together out of a shared trait, identity of race. On the other hand, he realises very well that Heidegger is the author who at a certain moment speaks of a true German community and leaves behind the openness and radical point of view he himself had postulated. Only this community, so Heidegger says in his famous rectoral speech, can lead to a proper existence. Heidegger was convinced the national-socialist movement would guarantee a collective escape from an improper existence. How this had to happen in a concrete way, Heidegger seemingly didn't know when he wrote Being and Time. He left his readers in a state of uncertainty, but this uncertainty didn't stop him from partaking in a horrible political regime, from connecting his thought to the national-socialist movement and from identifying himself with one of the most murderous political regimes ever.

It seems quite preposterous that an author like Nancy who announces the end of every immanent community, appeals to a philosopher who puts forward a true German community. How can Nancy, who explicitly writes against all nostalgia for provincialism, refer to Heidegger who withdrew into his hut in Todtnauberg?

As already said, Nancy's attitude towards Heidegger is twofold, and he also makes this clear in his text 'La decision d'existence' (published in Une pensée finie). On the one hand, he is inspired by Heidegger's articulation of being-with. On the other hand, he wants to question fundamentally every claim that Heidegger makes regarding a proper or original community. Out of Nancy's analysis in Être singulier pluriel it becomes clear that this is exactly the obstacle in Heidegger’s philosophical reflection on being-with, and in the contemporary philosophical and ethical complaint of a lost community (although one cannot compare the two in many points). In this respect, think again of the important role that the communitarians are playing nowadays, with very influential authors like Charles Taylor, Michael Sandel and Alasdair MacIntyre.

In his interest in Heidegger, Nancy is touching the problem of community at its deepest core. Heidegger's ambiguity is a signal for him to develop the 'with’, the constitutive relationality of being-there, and to radicalise it in what he calls an analysis of the coexistential. This is a fundamental analysis of the way that we stand to each other and to the world and how this can be the basis for a thinking of community. This, and the attempt to think community in a radical way as being-with, gets its start in Heidegger’s Being and Time but is, according to Nancy, largely insufficient.

5. Ontology

a. Globalization

The theme of community is one of the main and most interesting threads throughout Nancy's work, but there are numerous other themes and questions in his work. Nancy is not only very familiar with a large part of the history of philosophy (see his books on Kant, Descartes, Hegel, and so forth), but he also discusses in his work political themes like justice, sovereignty and freedom, and how they may apply in our increasingly global world. He always maintains a very singular voice and perspective. Take for example the contemporary debate on globalization. In 1993, Nancy wrote his book Le sens du monde in which he searched for what we mean when we say that we are living in a world, or in one world; about what we mean when we say that the sense of the world is no longer situated above but within the world. The world, the existence, that is our radical responsibility he says, but by this doesn't mean that we are always responsible for everything and everyone. He wants to make clear that the political, juridical or moral responsibility in concrete situations is based on a preceding ontological responsibility. From the moment that the measure for our responsibility is no longer given by a metaphysical or divine order, we are living in a world where we are exposed to a naked existence, without the possibility to fall back upon a preceding fundamental cause of the world. For Nancy, the contingency of our naked existence is not in the first place a moral problem. It is an ontological question. Whereas in a feudal world the meaning and destination of life was clear and fixed, contemporary existence can no longer refer to a general metaphysical framework. Nothing other than this contingency is the challenge for our global existence today, says Nancy. It is indeed the case that today we are confronted with a lot of uncertainties and that we are thrown into many complex situations, but it is not certain at all whether that is something we should complain about.

For Nancy, becoming-worldly means, in the first place, responding to the demands of our time. He asks what it means when we think today that we are living in a world. Becoming-worldwide is in a radical way being exposed to sense, to the world as such. The 'sense of the world' is in no way still given by a creator. What is left as a horizon is that the world, and only the world, is there. Sense is not so much something that we, as secularised successors to God, ascribe to the world. This would only confirm the idea that the world stands for a lack of sense, or for an 'object' to which sense is given from outside by a 'subject'. Thus Nancy says we have to think 'world' as beings who are always already in the world. There is nothing new about that and yet, he does not stop telling us. It seems so evident, almost banal, and this banality is what counts today. There's nothing hidden anymore behind the question of the world. We have to confront ourselves with this nothing, with this ex nihilo of the world. This ontology, this logic of the ontos, is what Nancy wants us to deal with, as he makes clear in one of his most recent books La création du monde ou la mondialisation.

b. Deconstructing Christianity

Thinking through the problem of globalisation means for Nancy at the same time deconstructing Christianity. Of course, a deconstruction of Christianity is different from a mere criticism of Christianity. It is the question of whether atheism is the antipode of religion, or if religion has a sort of auto-critical gesture towards itself. We 'moderns' love to say that we are no longer Christians, but maybe the Christian aspects of our existence are so evident that we are no longer conscious of them. Take for example the question whether our existence has a meaning. The thought that existence has indeed a meaning and that this meaning is attached to existence by some self constituting thing—whether it is a God or a subject—is present in atheism as much as in Christianity. Also the nihilistic claim that existence is meaningless starts from this idea.

Nancy therefore tries to think 'the sense of the world' out of the transcendental conditions of our existence. An atheist's world is a world in which sense is no longer attached to the world, but where it is the condition of our being-in-the-world as such. The world does not have sense, it is sense, and this naked existence means that we have to exist in the sense that we are, and can no longer hide behind some or another presupposed meaning of life. We are exposed to the world and to ourselves, and that is the sense of existence.

At first sight, Nancy seems to limit himself to a sort of affirmation of the status quo of the world as it is, and it seems that he affirms the common idea that since the collapse of the former socialist states we would live in an accomplished humanity. It seems, especially, that we cannot disagree on the 'good' of some matters: there are human rights, individual liberties and humanitarian missions of the UN to keep guard over this moral world order, and so forth. Nancy's thesis is nothing but the questioning of that very idea, and it seems to me that the work of Nancy in general becomes interesting when it is used as a hyperbolic questioning of that sort of philosophical or political correctness.

6. Sovereignty

As much as in his earlier work like L'oubli de la philosophie in 1986 as in many other texts like Changement de monde in 1998, Nancy questions in a very singular way the evidences and rhetorics of our time. That certainly does not mean that he is only a social or political philosopher. If philosophy has to be engaged today, he says, it has in the first place the task to philosophize. Let's take one example to make that clear.

One sees that with an ever growing number of missions the UN continually tries, with or without success, to quench potential hotspots here and there, and thus to maintain the order in and of the world. By means of humanitarian interventions one wants to apply international law in places where it is violated. These interventions seem to indicate that there is no longer any sovereignty. There is no longer a declaration of war from one sovereign to another, but an application of international law in the name of humanity in general. There are nevertheless, Nancy analyses, a number of signs or symptoms that seem to show that sovereignty is still playing a part in contemporary politics, albeit in a subdued, private manner. This reluctance to talk about sovereignty on the one hand, and the full use of its symbolic values on the other, were the motivations for Nancy to write a text about the Gulf War. In it, he examined what part sovereignty can still play in contemporary political and social thinking. The waning role of sovereignty in the West, and its subdued return in the Gulf War, is a given which he consciously wants to confront rather than forget. For his analysis, Nancy was inspired by what Carl Schmitt made clear with the slogan: one who says humanity, wants to cheat. Even if a state pretends to make war in the name of humanity, it takes over a universal concept to use it polemically against its opponent, its enemy. A world which is becoming worldwide tends to, explains Schmitt, criminalize its enemies. It no longer suffices to put the enemy back behind his borders. One goes looking for him in his own national territory and disqualifies him in a moral way. He becomes literally inhuman: he falls out of the moral human order, he is an illegal combatant, as the U.S. government called the Taliban prisoners.

7. Art and Culture

Finally I want to point to the fact that Nancy is also a very influential philosopher of art and culture. Already in 1978 he published with Lacoue-Labarthe a book on the Jena-romantics of the Schlegel brothers. The book is called L'absolu littéraire (translated as The Literary Absolute in 1987) and sets up a large discussion of the Jena romantiek, the German 'Frühromantik': the place and the group of the brothers August Wilhelm and Friedrich Schlegel (and partially also Novalis and Schelling). This study focuses on the review Athenaeum published by the brothers Schlegel at Jena, who thereafter founded a literary circle. Lacoue-Labarthe and Nancy focus on the question of literature realising and fulfilling itself as a work, an œuvre as it is called in the French language: the writer produces himself in the literary work he writes so that he, as the subject, the support of this work, becomes himself an œuvre, a self-productive individual. L'absolu littéraire points at the fact that a lot of these romantic themes still play a substantial role in our modern society.

Besides his interest for literature, film, theatre and poetry, Nancy also writes many contributions in art catalogues, especially in relation to contemporary art. At various different times, Nancy also exhibited some of his own work together with the French artist François Martin, and he has also written a few poems and theatre texts. One can read his philosophical reflections on the statute of art in general, in the book Les Muses, published in 1994 (translated as The Muses in 1996). In it, Hegel's thesis of the death of art takes a central place. There is also a text from a lecture from 1992 at the Louvre museum in Paris on the painting 'The death of the virgin' by the Italian painter Caravaggio. This text was already published in 1993, in a number of Paragraph, fully dedicated to Nancy's work. From Caravaggio's painting, Nancy is looking for another conception of painting. The painting is not a representation of the empirical world—understood in the platonic, metaphysical way—but a presentation of world, of sense, of existence:

'From the inside of (the)painting to the outside of (the) painting, there is nothing, no passage. There is painting, there is us, indistinctly, distinctly. Here, (the) painting is our access to the fact that we do not accede—either to the inside or to the outside of ourselves. Thus we exist. This [Caravaggio's] painting paints the threshold of existence. In these conditions, to paint does not mean to represent, but simply to pose the ground, the texture, and the pigment of the threshold' (in Kamuf P. (ed.), Paragraph, 1993, p. 115)

In 2001, Nancy published The Evidence of Film, a book on the Iranian filmmaker Abbas Kiarostami. In it, he writes that:

'Cinema presents—that is to say shares (communicates)—the intensity of a look upon a world of which it is itself part and parcel (a film properly speaking and as video, as television, but also as photography and as music: these motives will come up again). It is part of it precisely in the sense that it has contributed to its structure as it is now: as a world where looking at what is real is resolutely substituting for every kind of visionary seeing, foreseeing and clairvoyant gazing. […] Clearly, films turn out (with photography, of course, and starting with it: Kiarostami never forgets this, and this will have to be discussed) to be something very different from a relatively new support for received ways of experience (stories or feelings, myth or dream, etc.). Well beyond the medium that it also is, cinema adds up an element: the element of looking and of what is real insofar as it is looked at. All in one, film is ubiquitous, it can take in everything, from one far end of the earth to the other …' (The Evidence of Film, p. 20).

Nancy also wrote numerous texts on art in several international journals. Texts on Baudelaire, the relation between image and violence, the problem of representation in art, the statute of literature, on Hölderlin, on contemporary artists On Kawara and Soun-gui and even on techno-music. It seems that nothing is unfamiliar with the philosopher Nancy.

8. References and Further Reading

Major works of Nancy:

  • La Remarque spéculative (Un bon mot de Hegel), Paris, Galilée, 1973.
  • La titre de la lettre, Paris, Galilée, 1973 (with Philippe Lacoue-Labarthe)
  • Le Discours de la syncope. I. Logodaedalus, Paris, Flammarion, 1975.
  • L'absolu littéraire. Théorie de la littérature du romantisme allemand, Paris, Seuil, 1978 (with Philippe Lacoue-Labarthe).
  • Ego sum, Paris, Flammarion, 1979.
  • Le partage des voix, Paris, Galilée, 1982.
  • La communauté désoeuvrée, Paris, Christian Bourgois, 1983.
  • L'Impératif catégorique, Paris, Flammarion, 1983.
  • L'oubli de la philosophie, Paris, Galilée, 1986.
  • Des lieux divins, Mauvezin, T.E.R, 1987.
  • L'expérience de la liberté, Paris, Galilée, 1988.
  • Une Pensée Finie, Paris, Galilée, 1990.
  • Le poids d'une pensée, Québec, Le griffon d'argile, 1991.
  • Le mythe nazi, La tour d'Aigues, L'Aube, 1991 (with Philippe Lacoue-Labarthe)
  • La comparution (politique à venir), Paris, Bourgois, 1991 (with Jean-Chrisophe Bailly).
  • Corpus, Paris, Métailié, 1992.
  • The birth to presence, Stanford, Stanford University Press, 1993.
  • Les Muses, Paris, Galilée, 1994.
  • Être singulier pluriel, Paris, Galilée, 1996.
  • Hegel. L'inquiétude du négatif, Paris, Hachette, 1997.
  • L'Intrus, Paris, Galilée, 2000.
  • Le regard du portrait, Paris, Galilée, 2000.
  • La pensée dérobée. Paris, Galilée, 2001.
  • The evidence of film. Bruxelles, Yves Gevaert, 2001.
  • La création du monde ou la mondialisation. Paris, Galilée, 2002.

English translations: almost all of Nancy's major works are translated into English:

  • The Inoperative Community (1991). Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press.
  • The Birth to Presence (1993): Stanford University Press.
  • The Experience of Freedom (1993). Stanford University Press.
  • The Gravity of Thought (1997). New Jersey: Humanities Press.
  • Retreating the Political (1997). With Lacoue-Labarthe (edited by Simon Sparks). London: Routledge.
  • The Sense of the World (1998). Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press.
  • Being Singular Plural (2000). Stanford University Press

Secondary bibliography

  • Bernasconi R., On deconstructing nostalgia for community within the West: the debate between Nancy and Blanchot, Research in Phenomenology, 23, 3-21, 1993.
  • Derrida J., Le Toucher, Jean-Luc Nancy, Paris, Galilée, 2000.
  • Devisch I., A trembling voice in the desert. Jean-Luc Nancy's re-thinking of the space of the political, Cultural Values, 4(2), 239-255, 2000.
  • Devisch I, La «Négativité Sans Emploi». SymposiumIV(2):167-87, 2000.
  • Devisch I, 'Wij. Jean-Luc Nancy en het vraagstuk van de gemeenschap' (Uitgeverij Peeters, Leuven, 2003, forthcoming)
  • Dow K., Ex-posing identity: Derrida and Nancy on the (im) possibility. Philosophy and Social Criticism, 19 (3-4), 261-271, 1993.
  • Kamuf P.(ed.), Paragraph. On the Work of Jean-Luc Nancy, 16(2), 1993.
  • May T., The community's absence in Lyotard, Nancy and Lacoue-Labarthe. Philosophy Today, 275-284, 1993.
  • May T., Reconsidering difference. Nancy, Derrida, Levinas, and Deleuze. Pennsylvania, The Pennsylvania State University Press, 1997.
  • Sheppard D. e.a., On Jean-Luc Nancy. The sense of philosophy, London, Routledge, 1997.
  • Studies in Practical Philosophy 1(1), 1999 (fully dedicated to the work of Nancy).

Author Information

Ignaas Devisch
Free University Brussels

Robert Nozick (1938—2002)

Nozick1A thinker with wide-ranging interests, Robert Nozick is one of the most important and influential political philosophers, along with  John Rawls,  in the Anglo-American analytic tradition. His first and most celebrated book, Anarchy, State, and Utopia (1974), produced, along with his Harvard colleague John Rawls’ A Theory of Justice (1971), the revival of the discipline of social and political philosophy within the analytic school. Rawls’ influential book is a systematic defense of egalitarian liberalism, but Nozick’s Anarchy, State, and Utopia is a compelling defense of free-market libertarianism.

Unlike Rawls, Nozick neglected political philosophy for the rest of his philosophical career. He moved on to address other philosophical questions and made significant contributions to other areas of philosophical inquiry. In epistemology, Nozick developed an externalist analysis of knowledge in terms of counterfactual conditions that provides a response to radical skepticism. In metaphysics, he proposed a “closest continuer” theory of personal identity.

His final work, Invariances (2001), offers a theory of objective reality. His other significant contributions to analytic philosophy notwithstanding, Nozick’s defense of libertarianism remains his most notable intellectual mark on philosophical inquiry.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Anarchy, State, and Utopia and Libertarianism
    1. Self-Ownership, Individual Rights, and the Minimal State
    2. Refuting the Anarchist
    3. Distributive Justice
    4. Utopia
  3. Epistemology
  4. Personal Identity
  5. Conclusion
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Life

Robert Nozick was born in Brooklyn, New York in 1938, and he taught at Harvard University until his death in January 2002. He was a thinker of the prodigious sort who gains a reputation for brilliance within his chosen field while still in graduate school, in his case at the Princeton of the early 1960's, where he wrote his dissertation on decision theory under the supervision of Carl Hempel. He was also, like so many young intellectuals of that period, drawn initially to the politics of the New Left and to the socialism that was its philosophical inspiration. But encountering the works of such defenders of capitalism as F.A. Hayek, Ludwig von Mises, Murray Rothbard, and Ayn Rand eventually led him to renounce those views, and to shift his philosophical focus away from the technical issues then dominating analytic philosophy and toward political theory. The result was his first and most famous book, Anarchy, State, and Utopia (1974), an ingenious defense of libertarianism that immediately took on canonical status as the major right-wing philosophical counterpoint to his Harvard colleague John Rawls's influential defense of social-democratic liberalism, A Theory of Justice (1971).

Like Rawls's book, Nozick's generated lively debate and an enormous secondary literature. But where Rawls made the development of his theory of justice and its defense against critics his life's work, Nozick took little interest either in responding to critics of Anarchy, State, and Utopia in particular or in continuing to do systematic work in political philosophy in general. Instead, he moved on to produce groundbreaking work in several other areas of philosophical inquiry, particularly in epistemology and metaphysics. His development of an externalist theory of knowledge and his "closest continuer" account of personal identity have been particularly influential. It remains to be seen what impact on philosophy will be made by the general theory of objective truth developed in his last book, Invariances (2001), published shortly before his untimely death from stomach cancer. In any case, it seems clear, judging from the disproportionate amount of attention that it has received relative to the rest of his writings, that it is his early work in political theory that will stand as his most significant and lasting contribution.

2. Anarchy, State, and Utopia and Libertarianism

Anarchy, State, and Utopia is, together with Rawls's A Theory of Justice, generally regarded as one of the two great classics of twentieth-century analytic political philosophy. Indeed, these two works essentially revived the discipline of political philosophy within the analytic school, whose practitioners had, until Rawls and Nozick came along, largely neglected it. Nozick's book also revived interest in the notion of rights as being central to political theory, and it did so in the service of another idea that had been long neglected within academic political thought, namely libertarianism.

Libertarianism is a political philosophy holding that the role of the state in society ought to be severely limited, confined essentially to police protection, national defense, and the administration of courts of law, with all other tasks commonly performed by modern governments - education, social insurance, welfare, and so forth - taken over by religious bodies, charities, and other private institutions operating in a free market. Many libertarians appeal, in defending their position, to economic and sociological considerations - the benefits of market competition, the inherent mechanisms inclining state bureaucracies toward incompetence and inefficiency, the poor record of governmental attempts to deal with specific problems like poverty and pollution, and so forth. Nozick endorses such arguments, but his main defense of libertarianism is a moral one, his view being that whatever its practical benefits, the strongest reason to advocate a libertarian society is simply that such advocacy follows from a serious respect for individual rights.

a. Self-Ownership, Individual Rights, and the Minimal State

Nozick takes his position to follow from a basic moral principle associated with Immanuel Kant and enshrined in Kant's second formulation of his famous Categorical Imperative: "Act so that you treat humanity, whether in your own person or in that of another, always as an end and never as a means only." The idea here is that a human being, as a rational agent endowed with self-awareness, free will, and the possibility of formulating a plan of life, has an inherent dignity and cannot properly be treated as a mere thing, or used against his will as an instrument or resource in the way an inanimate object might be.

In line with this, Nozick also describes individual human beings as self-owners (though it isn't clear whether he regards this as a restatement of Kant’s principle, a consequence of it, or an entirely independent idea). The thesis of self-ownership, a notion that goes back in political philosophy at least to John Locke, is just the claim that individuals own themselves - their bodies, talents and abilities, labor, and by extension the fruits or products of their exercise of their talents, abilities and labor. They have all the prerogatives with respect to themselves that a slaveholder claims with respect to his slaves. But the thesis of self-ownership would in fact rule out slavery as illegitimate, since each individual, as a self-owner, cannot properly be owned by anyone else. (Indeed, many libertarians would argue that unless one accepts the thesis of self-ownership, one has no way of explaining why slavery is evil. After all, it cannot be merely because slaveholders often treat their slaves badly, since a kind-hearted slaveholder would still be a slaveholder, and thus morally blameworthy, for that. The reason slavery is immoral must be because it involves a kind of stealing - the stealing of a person from himself.)

But if individuals are inviolable ends-in-themselves (as Kant describes them) and self-owners, it follows, Nozick says, that they have certain rights, in particular (and here again following Locke) rights to their lives, liberty, and the fruits of their labor. To own something, after all, just is to have a right to it, or, more accurately, to possess the bundle of rights - rights to possess something, to dispose of it, to determine what may be done with it, etc. - that constitute ownership; and thus to own oneself is to have such rights to the various elements that make up one's self. These rights function, Nozick says, as side-constraints on the actions of others; they set limits on how others may, morally speaking, treat a person. So, for example, since you own yourself, and thus have a right to yourself, others are constrained morally not to kill or maim you (since this would involve destroying or damaging your property), or to kidnap you or forcibly remove one of your bodily organs for transplantation in someone else (since this would involve stealing your property). They are also constrained not to force you against your will to work for another's purposes, even if those purposes are good ones. For if you own yourself, it follows that you have a right to determine whether and how you will use your self-owned body and its powers, e.g. either to work or to refrain from working.

So far this all might seem fairly uncontroversial. But what follows from it, in Nozick's view, is the surprising and radical conclusion that taxation, of the redistributive sort in which modern states engage in order to fund the various programs of the bureaucratic welfare state, is morally illegitimate. It amounts to a kind of forced labor, for the state so structures the tax system that any time you labor at all, a certain amount of your labor time - the amount that produces the wealth taken away from you forcibly via taxation - is time you involuntarily work, in effect, for the state. Indeed, such taxation amounts to partial slavery, for in giving every citizen an entitlement to certain benefits (welfare, social security, or whatever), the state in effect gives them an entitlement, a right, to a part of the proceeds of your labor, which produces the taxes that fund the benefits; every citizen, that is, becomes in such a system a partial owner of you (since they have a partial property right in part of you, i.e. in your labor). But this is flatly inconsistent with the principle of self-ownership.

The various programs of the modern liberal welfare state are thus immoral, not only because they are inefficient and incompetently administered, but because they make slaves of the citizens of such a state. Indeed, the only sort of state that can be morally justified is what Nozick calls a minimal state or "night-watchman" state, a government which protects individuals, via police and military forces, from force, fraud, and theft, and administers courts of law, but does nothing else. In particular, such a state cannot regulate what citizens eat, drink, or smoke (since this would interfere with their right to use their self-owned bodies as they see fit), cannot control what they publish or read (since this would interfere with their right to use the property they've acquired with their self-owned labor - e.g. printing presses and paper - as they wish), cannot administer mandatory social insurance schemes or public education (since this would interfere with citizens' rights to use the fruits of their labor as they desire, in that some citizens might decide that they would rather put their money into private education and private retirement plans), and cannot regulate economic life in general via minimum wage and rent control laws and the like (since such actions are not only economically suspect - tending to produce bad unintended consequences like unemployment and housing shortages - but violate citizens' rights to charge whatever they want to for the use of their own property).

b. Refuting the Anarchist

It might be thought that given Nozick's premises, no state at all, minimal or otherwise, could be justified, that full-blown anarchism is what really follows from the notion of self-ownership. For the activities of even a minimal state would need to be funded via taxation. Wouldn't this taxation also amount to forced labor and partial slavery? Nozick thinks not. Indeed, in his view it turns out that even if an anarchistic society existed, not only could a minimal state nevertheless arise out of it in a way that violates no one's self-ownership rights, in fact such a state would, morally speaking, have to come into existence.

Suppose there is a certain geographical area in which no state exists, and everyone must protect his own rights to life, liberty, and property, without relying on a government and its police and military to do so. Given that doing so would be costly, difficult, and time-consuming, people would, Nozick says, inevitably band together to form voluntary protection associations, agreeing to take turns standing watch over each others' property, to decide collectively how to punish rights-violators, and so forth. Eventually some members of this anarchistic community would decide to go into the protection business full-time, instituting a private firm that would offer protection services to members of the community in exchange for a fee. Other members of the community might start competing firms, and a free market would develop in protection services.

Inevitably, Nozick argues, this process will (via a kind of "invisible hand" mechanism of the sort discussed by economists) give rise to either a single dominant firm or a dominant confederation of firms. For most people will surely judge that where protection of their lives and property is concerned, nothing short of the biggest and most powerful provider of such protection will do, so that they will flock to whatever firm is perceived as such; and the "snowball" effect this will create will ensure that that firm ends up with an overwhelming share of the market. Even if multiple large firms come into being, however, they are likely to form a kind of single dominant association of firms. For there will be occasions when the clients of different firms come into conflict with one another, one client accusing the other of violating his rights, the other insisting on his innocence. Firms could go to war over the claims of their respective clients, but this would be costly, especially if (as is likely) such conflicts between clients became frequent. More feasible would be an agreement between firms to abide by certain common rules for adjudicating disputes between clients and to go along with the decisions of arbitrators retained by the firms to interpret these rules - to institute, that is, a common quasi-legal system of sorts. With the advent of such a dominant protection agency (or confederation of agencies) - an organization comprised essentially of analogues of police and military forces and courts of law - our anarchistic society will obviously have gone a long way toward evolving a state, though strictly speaking, this agency is still a private firm rather than a government.

How will the dominant protection agency deal with independents - those (relatively few) individuals who retain no protection firm and insist on defending their rights themselves - who attempt to mete out justice to those of its clients they accuse of rights violations? Will it allow them to try and punish its clients as they see fit? Nozick argues that the dominant agency will not allow this and, morally speaking, must not. For the agency was hired to protect its clients' rights, and that includes a right not to be arrested, tried, or punished unjustly or, where one really is guilty of a rights violation, to be punished more harshly than one deserves. Of course, its clients might really be guilty; but the point is, so long as the dominant agency doesn't itself know that they are, it cannot allow them to be punished. The dominant agency must, accordingly, generally prohibit independents from defending their own rights against its clients; it must take upon itself the exclusive right to decide which of its clients is worthy of punishment, and what sort of punishment that ought to be.

In doing so, however, it has taken on one of the defining features of a state, namely, a monopoly on the legitimate use of force. It has become what Nozick calls an "ultra-minimal state." In doing so, however, the dominant agency seems to have jeopardized the rights of independents - for though it has (rightly) prohibited those independents from exacting justice on its own clients, lest they inflict unjust punishments, it has thereby also left them unable to defend their own rights. To avoid committing an injustice against independents, then, the dominant agency or ultra-minimal state must compensate them for this - it must, that is, defend their rights for them by providing them the very protection services it affords its own clients. It can, Nozick says, legitimately charge them for this protection, but only the amount that they would have spent anyway in defending themselves. The end result of this process, though, is that the ultra-minimal state has taken on another feature of a state, namely the provision of protection to everyone within its borders. Moreover, in charging everyone for this protection it engages, in effect, in a kind of taxation (though this taxation - and only this taxation – does not violate self-ownership rights, because the original clients of the agency pay voluntarily, while the later, formerly independent, clients are charged only an amount they would have spent anyway for protection). The ultra-minimal state has thus become a full-fledged minimal state.

A minimal state would thus inevitably arise out of an originally anarchic society, given both practical circumstances and the moral requirements - concerning the prohibition of potentially rights-violating self-defense and compensation for this prohibition - binding on any agency acting to enforce the rights of others. And it would do so in a way that violates no one's rights of self-ownership. So the anarchist can have no principled objection to it.

Nozick's conception of the origins of the state is reminiscent of the social contract tradition in political thought represented by Hobbes, Locke, Rousseau, and, in contemporary thought, Rawls. For insofar as the state arises out of a process that begins with the voluntary retention by individuals of the services of an agency that will inevitably take on the features of a state, it can be seen to be the result of a kind of contract. The details of the state-originating process in Nozick's account are very different from those of other social contract accounts, however; and, most importantly, for Nozick, unlike other social contract theorists, individual rights do not result from, but exist prior to, any social contract, and put severe constraints on the shape such a contract can take. Furthermore, the parties to the contract in Nozick's conception are to be imagined very much on the model of human beings as we know them in "real life," rather than along the lines of the highly abstractly conceived rational agents deliberating behind a "veil of ignorance" in Rawls's "original position" thought experiment.

c. Distributive Justice

Most critics of the libertarian minimal state don't complain that it allows for too much government; they say that it allows for far too little. In particular, they claim that a more-than-minimal state is necessary in order to fulfill the requirements of distributive justice. The state, it is held (by, for instance, Rawls and his followers), simply must engage in redistributive taxation in order to ensure that a fair distribution of wealth and income obtains in the society it governs. Nozick's answer to this objection constitutes his "entitlement theory" of justice.

Talk about "distributive justice" is inherently misleading, Nozick argues, in that it seems to imply that there is some central authority who "distributes" to individuals shares of wealth and income that pre-exist the distribution, as if they had appeared like "manna from heaven." Of course this is not really the way such shares come into existence, or come to be "distributed," at all; in fact they come to be, and come to be held by the individuals who hold them, only through the scattered efforts and transactions of these innumerable individuals themselves, and these individuals' efforts and transactions give them a moral claim over these shares. Talk about the "distribution of wealth" covers this up, and unjustifiably biases most discussions of distributive justice in a socialist or egalitarian liberal direction.

A more adequate theory of justice would in Nozick's view enumerate three principles of justice in holdings. The first would be a principle of justice in acquisition, that is, the appropriation of natural resources that no one has ever owned before. The best-known such principle, some version of which Nozick seems to endorse, is the one enshrined in Locke's theory of property, according to which a person (being a self-owner) owns his labor, and by "mixing his labor" with a previously unowned part of the natural world (e.g. by whittling a stick found in a forest into a spear) thereby comes to own it. The second principle would be a principle of justice in transfer, governing the manner in which one might justly come to own something previously owned by another. Here Nozick endorses the principle that a transfer of holdings is just if and only if it is voluntary, a principle that would seem to follow from respect for a person's right to use the fruits of the exercise of his self-owned talents, abilities, and labor as he sees fit. The final principle would be a principle of justice in rectification, governing the proper means of setting right past injustices in acquisition and transfer.

Anyone who got what he has in a manner consistent with these three principles would, Nozick says, accordingly be entitled to it - for, his having abided by these principles, no one has any grounds for complaint against him. This gives us Nozick's entitlement theory of distributive justice: a distribution of wealth obtaining in a society as a whole is a just distribution if everyone in that society is entitled to what he has, i.e. has gotten his holdings in accordance with the principles of acquisition, transfer, and rectification. And it is therefore just however equal or unequal it happens to be, and indeed however "fair" or "unfair" it might seem intuitively to be. Standard theories of distributive justice, Nozick says, are either ahistorical "end-state" or “end-result” theories, requiring that the distribution of wealth in a society have a certain structure, e.g. an egalitarian structure (regardless of how the distribution came about or how people got what they have); or they are historical theories requiring that the distribution fit a certain pattern reflecting such historical circumstances as who worked the hardest or who deserves the most. The entitlement theory of justice is historical yet unpatterned: The justice of a distribution is indeed determined by certain historical circumstances (contrary to end-state theories), but it has nothing to do with fitting any pattern guaranteeing that those who worked the hardest or are most deserving have the most shares. What matters is only that people get what they have in a manner consistent with the three principles of justice in holdings, and this is fully compatible with some people having much more than others, unlucky hard workers having less than lazier but luckier ones, morally repulsive individuals having higher incomes than saints, and so forth.

Nozick illustrates and defends the entitlement theory in a famous thought-experiment involving the basketball player Wilt Chamberlain. Imagine a society in which the distribution of wealth fits a particular structure or pattern favored by a non-entitlement conception of justice - suppose, to keep things simple, that it is an equal distribution, and call it D1. Nozick's opponent must of course grant that this distribution is just, since Nozick has allowed the opponent himself to determine it. Now suppose that among the members of this society is Wilt Chamberlain, and that he has as a condition of his contract with his team that he will play only if each person coming to see the game puts twenty-five cents into a special box at the gate of the sports arena, the contents of which will go to him. Suppose further that over the course of the season, one million fans decide to pay the twenty-five cents to watch him play. The result will be a new distribution, D2, in which Chamberlain now has $250,000, much more than anyone else - a distribution which thereby breaks the original pattern established in D1. Now, is D2 just? Is Chamberlain entitled to his money? The answer to these questions, Nozick says, is clearly "Yes." For everyone in D1 was, by hypothesis, entitled to what he had; there is no injustice in the starting point that led up to D2. Moreover, everyone who gave up twenty-five cents in the transition from D1 to D2 did so voluntarily, and thus has no grounds for complaint; and those who did not want to pay to see Chamberlain play still have their twenty-five cents, so they have no grounds for complaint either. But then no one has any grounds for a complaint of injustice; and thus there is no injustice.

What this shows, in Nozick's view, is that all non-entitlement theories of justice are false. For all such theories claim that it is a necessary condition for a distribution's being just that it have a certain structure or fit a certain pattern; but the Wilt Chamberlain example (which can be reformulated so that D1 is, instead of an egalitarian distribution, a distribution according to hard work, desert, or whatever) shows that a distribution (such as D2) can be just even if it doesn't have a particular structure or pattern.

Moreover, the example shows that "liberty upsets patterns," that allowing individuals freely to use their holdings as they choose will inevitably destroy any distribution advocated by non-entitlement theories, whether they be socialist, egalitarian liberal, or some other theory of distribution. And the corollary of this is that patterns destroy liberty, that attempts to enforce a particular distributional pattern or structure over time will necessarily involve intolerable levels of coercion, forbidding individuals from using the fruits of their talents, abilities, and labor as they see fit. As Nozick puts it, "the socialist society would have to forbid capitalist acts between consenting adults." This is not merely a regrettable side-effect of the quest to attain a just distribution of wealth; it is a positive injustice, for it violates the principle of self-ownership.

Distributive justice, properly understood, thus does not require a redistribution of wealth; indeed, it forbids such a redistribution. Accordingly, the minimal state, far from being inconsistent with the demands of distributive justice, is in fact the only sure means of securing those demands.

d. Utopia

The minimal state might seem, even to those sympathetic to the arguments for it, to make for a rather austere vision of political life. But Nozick insists that we ought to see it as "inspiring, as well as right." Indeed, the minimal state constitutes in his view a kind of utopia. For, among all models of political order, it alone makes possible the attempt to realize every person's and group’s vision of the good society. It is often thought that libertarianism entails that everyone must live according to a laissez faire capitalist ethos, but this is not so; it requires only that, whatever ethos one is committed to, one not impose it by force on anyone else without his consent. If some individuals or groups want to live according to socialist or egalitarian principles, they are free to do so as far as Nozick is concerned; indeed, they may even establish a community, of whatever size, within the boundaries of the minimal state, and require that everyone who comes to live within it must agree to have a portion of his wealth redistributed. All they are forbidden from doing is forcing people to join or contribute to the establishment of such a community who do not want to do so.

The minimal state thus constitutes a "framework for utopia" - an overarching system within the boundaries of which any number of social, moral, and religious utopian visions may be realized. It thereby provides a way for people even of radically opposed points of view - socialists and capitalists, liberals and conservatives, atheists and religious believers, whether Jews, Christians, Muslims, Buddhists, Hindus - to make a go of implementing their conceptions of how life ought to be lived, within their own communities, while living side by side in peace. This gives us, in Nozick's view, a further reason to endorse it.

3. Epistemology

Nozick's most influential contributions to philosophy outside of political theory have been in epistemology and the metaphysics of personal identity. In the case of the former, he is best known for his version of an "externalist" theory of knowledge, developed in his second book, Philosophical Explanations (1981).

Traditional theories of knowledge hold that a knower S knows a proposition p if and only if S believes p, p is true, and S is justified in believing p.

The third condition has always been the most problematic: the logical possibility of skeptical scenarios in which the would-be knower is the hapless victim of an omnipotent, omniscient, and deceiving Cartesian demon, or a brain in a vat hooked up by mad scientists to a virtual reality supercomputer feeding it non-stop hallucinations, threaten to make the justification of almost any belief impossible. Examples of the sort made famous by Edmund Gettier - wherein S has a justified true belief (say, a belief that it is now 5:00, based on S's glance at a nearby clock) that nevertheless does not plausibly amount to knowledge (say, because the clock is broken, and just by chance happens to be displaying the correct time) - also cast doubt on the adequacy of the traditional analysis of knowledge, whatever one says about the threat of skepticism.

These supposed inadequacies in the traditional view of knowledge are often said by its critics to stem from its "internalism" - the assumption that the factors that warrant S's claim to knowledge must be factors of which S is aware: factors internal to the set of his consciously held beliefs. But these inadequacies can, it is argued, be remedied by adopting an externalist perspective instead, on which the factors that warrant S's belief, and make it genuine knowledge rather than mere belief, may well be factors of which S is entirely unaware, and which are external to his conscious cognitive processes. One such factor (emphasized by "reliabilist" versions of externalism) might be a belief's having been produced by a reliable belief-producing mechanism: a mechanism of the existence and operations of which S might be utterly ignorant.

Nozick's unique contribution to the externalist approach is to suggest that the conditions that make S's true belief that p count as knowledge are the counterfactuals: (a) that were p not true S would not believe it (the "variation" condition), and (b) that were p still true in somewhat different circumstances, S would still believe it and would not believe that not-p (the "adherence" condition). A belief that fulfills these conditions is one that, in Nozick's expression, "tracks the truth." (S’s belief that it is 5:00 in the example above would fail to meet these conditions, and thus fails to track the truth: had it in fact been 4:55 when S looked at the broken clock, he would still have believed that it is 5:00; and had the clock been stopped at 4:55 instead, S would not believe that it is 5:00, and indeed would believe that it is not 5:00.)

Nozick applies this analysis to answering skepticism as follows. We ought to concede to the skeptic that S cannot know that he is not in fact a brain in a vat, for his belief that he isn't is not one that tracks the truth (since the variation condition can't be met - if it were not true that S is not a brain in a vat, S would still believe he isn't). But though this might appear to give away the store to skepticism, in fact it does not. For what the skeptic claims to threaten are everyday beliefs such as, e.g., S's belief that he is driving in his car - for obviously, if S is actually a brain in a vat, he isn't really driving in his car. Nozick argues that S can indeed know that he is driving and know that if he is driving then he isn't a brain in a vat, even though he cannot know that he isn't a brain in a vat. For it may well be that S's belief that he is driving tracks the truth (it might, for instance, be produced by a reliable belief-forming process) even if his belief that he isn't a brain in a vat doesn't; and if so, then it is at least possible, contra the skeptic, to know, for example, that one is driving in one's car. In taking this position, Nozick famously, and controversially, denies what is known among epistemologists as the "closure principle," the principle that if S knows that p and that p entails q, then S knows that q.

4. Personal Identity

Nozick's contribution to the debate over personal identity is his "closest continuer" theory, also presented in Philosophical Explanations. Philosophical puzzles over personal identity arise from various bizarre thought experiments that seem to present genuine logical possibilities. For instance, there is Locke's famous example of the prince and the cobbler, wherein the man who wakes up in the cobbler's body one morning appears to have all the memories of the prince, and none of the memories of the cobbler. So who is the man actually in the cobbler's body, the prince or the cobbler himself? Or we can imagine a person A stepping into a teleportation machine of the sort described in science-fiction stories, and, due to some glitch in the machine's operation, not one but two persons similar to A, call them B and C, appearing in the spot where the machine was supposed to send A. Which, if either, is the "real" A?

Nozick's answer to such questions is that it is the later person who "most closely continues" the earlier one who is the one who is truly identical to the latter. What counts as closeness in this context is not susceptible of a simple, cut and dried answer. If we take psychological properties to be of greater importance to personhood than bodily ones, the closest continuer of the prince in Locke's example would be the man who wakes up in the cobbler’s body, even though he has none of the prince's bodily traits (and indeed, even though the prince's body may still exist, and especially if someone else - the cobbler, say -seems to be in the prince's body now). If instead we take bodily properties to be of greatest importance, then the closest continuer of the prince would be the person in the prince's body, whatever memories, if any, that person has. In any case, part of what counts as contributing to closeness is, in Nozick's view, going to be determined by a person’s own self-conception, by what a person himself takes to be most important to his identity.

What about the case where two or more individuals seem equally close continuers of an earlier person, as in the transporter example? Here Nozick's view is that, in the latter case, neither B nor C is identical to A - since there is no single closest continuer - and thus A no longer exists; though had only one person arrived in the spot to which the machine was supposed to send A, A would have continued to exist. Personal identity thus depends in part on factors extrinsic to the person himself.

5. Conclusion

Nozick made contributions to other areas of philosophy as well, developing a complex theory of rationality in The Nature of Rationality (1993) and meditating on the meaning of life in The Examined Life (1989), though these works received nothing like the attention garnered by Anarchy, State, and Utopia. But his work in epistemology and metaphysics has been nearly as controversial as his work in political philosophy, and has generated as large a literature. Time will tell whether similar controversy will be generated by his final work, Invariances, wherein he developed a theory of objective reality on which the mark of the objectively real or true, whether in science, metaphysics, or ethics, is "invariance under transformations," a property of the sort exhibited by the relationships between the numbers we use to measure the temperature, relationships which remain constant or "invariant" whether we use the Fahrenheit or centigrade scales, despite the various differences these scales exhibit in other respects.

In any event, it is almost certain that it is Nozick's defense of libertarianism that will stand as his most significant contribution to philosophy.

See also Robert Nozick's Political Philosophy.

6. References and Further Reading

  • G.A. Cohen, Self-Ownership, Freedom, and Equality (New York: Cambridge, University Press, 1995)
  • Edward Feser, On Nozick (Belmont, CA: Wadsworth, 2003)
  • Simon Hailwood, Exploring Nozick: Beyond Anarchy, State, and Utopia (Sydney: Avebury, 1996)
  • A.R. Lacey, Robert Nozick (Acumen Publishing Ltd., 2001)
  • Robert Nozick, Anarchy, State, and Utopia (New York: Basic Books, 1974)
  • Robert Nozick, Philosophical Explanations (Cambridge, MA: Belknap Press, 1981)
  • Robert Nozick, The Examined Life: Philosophical Meditations (New York: Simon and Schuster, 1989)
  • Robert Nozick, The Nature of Rationality (Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 1993)
  • Robert Nozick, Socratic Puzzles (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1997)
  • Robert Nozick, Invariances: The Structure of the Objective World (Cambridge, MA: Belknap Press, 2001)
  • Jeffrey Paul, ed., Reading Nozick: Essays on Anarchy, State, and Utopia (Totowa, NJ: Rowman and Littlefield, 1991)
  • David Schmidtz, ed., Robert Nozick (New York: Cambridge University Press, 2002)
  • Jonathan Wolff, Robert Nozick: Property, Justice, and the Minimal State (Stanford, CA: Stanford University Press, 1991)

Author Information

Edward Feser
Pasadena City College
U. S. A.

Madhva (1238—1317)

MadhvacharyaThe Dvaita or "dualist" school of Hindu Vedanta philosophy originated in 13th-century South India with Sri Madhvacarya (Madhva). Madhva, who considered himself an avatara of the wind-god Vayu, argued that a body of canonical texts called the "Vedanta" or "end of the Veda" taught the fundamental difference between the individual self or atman and the ultimate reality, brahman. According to Madhva there are two orders of reality: 1. svatantra, independent reality, which consists of Brahman alone and 2. paratantra, dependent reality, which consists of jivas (souls) and jada (lifeless objects). Although dependent reality would not exist apart from brahman's will, this very dependence creates a fundamental distinction between brahman and all else, implying a dualist view. By interpreting the Vedanta materials (especially the Upanisads, the Bhagavadgita and the Brahmasutras) along these lines, Madhva deliberately challenged the non-dualist reading in which the atman was identified with brahman. Madhva argued that the scriptures could not teach the identity of all beings because this would contradict ordinary perception, which tells us that we are different both from one another and from God. Madhva and his followers call their system tattvavada, "the realist viewpoint".

Table of Contents

  1. Madhva and Sankara
  2. Madhva and Ramanuja
  3. Dvaita Vedanta
  4. Canonical Sources
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Madhva and Sankara

The main tenet of Madhva's Dvaita Vedanta is that the Vedic tradition teaches a fundamental difference between the human soul or atman and the ultimate reality, brahman. This is markedly different from the earlier Advaita Vedanta, which Madhva often vociferously attacked. Sankara's A-dvaita or "non-dualist" Vedanta (9th century) argued that the atman is completely identical with brahman. According to Sankara, the atman experiences a false sense of plurality and individuality when under the influence of the delusive power of maya. While maya has the ambiguous ontological status of being neither real nor unreal, the only true reality is brahman. A soul becomes liberated from the cycle of rebirth (punar-janma) by realizing that its very experience of samsara is an illusion; its true identity is the singular objectless consciousness that constitutes pure being or brahman.

2. Madhva and Ramanuja

While Ramanuja's system of Visistadvaita Vedanta or "qualified non-dualism" modifies Sankara's position on the soul's identity with brahman, Madhva also rejected it. Ramanuja assumes a plurality of individual souls whose identity remains intact even after liberation but maintains that the souls share the essential nature of brahma. The souls are eternal particles issuing from brahman, who as their source retains its transcendence. Ramanuja maintains Visnu's distinct difference from the human soul and his supremacy as creator and redeemer. Ramanuja identifies brahman with Visnu, holding that brahman is saguna, i.e. possesses attributes, in contrast to Sankara's attributeless or "nirguna" brahman.

3. Dvaita Vedanta

Like Ramanuja, Madhva identifies brahman with Visnu. However, he argues that any system that allows for any identification of the atman with brahman undermines Visnu's supremacy, compromises His status, and strips devotional acts of their meaning. Madhva's insistence on the modal distinction between the atman and brahman, wherein the former is inalterably dependent upon--and therefore, fundamentally different from--the latter, insures Visnu-as-brahman's complete and utter transcendence of the human soul. For Madhva, this view alone makes devotion [bhakti] an essential component of religious belief and practice. Attaining Visnu's grace is the soul's only hope of achieving liberation [moksa] from the cycle of rebirth (samsara).

Like Ramanuja, Madhva opposes Sankara's conception of Brahman as nirguna or without qualities and as a pure self- consciousness. Madhva views Visnu as preeminent above all other deities on the basis of His unique characteristics. This emphasis on Visnu's particular collocation of attributes that renders Him distinct from all other gods, human souls, and the material world reveals another critical component of Madhva's philosophy which is his acceptance of an ontological plurality as a fundamental facet of being. Indeed, Madhva rejects the notion that brahman is the only truly existent entity (tattva) and he maintains that, even though living beings and inert matter are dependent upon Brahman, such dependence differentiates them from Him and makes them discrete entities (tattvas). Thus, reality in Madhva's system consists of three basic elements: God, the souls (jivasi), and insentient matter (jada).

Madhva's pluralistic ontology is founded on his realist epistemology, which in turn affects his Vedic hermeneutics. He argues that God and the human soul are separate because our daily experience of separateness from God and of plurality in general is presented to us as an undeniable fact, fundamental to our knowledge of all things. Madhva's emphasis on the validity of experience as a means of knowledge is intended to refute the nondualist position that the differences we experience in daily life are ultimately a shared illusion with the ambiguous ontological status of being neither real nor unreal. In Madhva's view, Advaita's denial of the innate validity of knowledge acquired through sense perception completely undermines our ability to know anything since we must always question the content of our knowledge. This questioning would encompass our knowledge of the sacred canon, which is accessible to us only through our ability to perceive it and to draw inferences from it. Madhva argues that perception and inference must be innately valid and the reality they present us with must be actually and ultimately real since such a position is the only one that allows us to know the content of the Vedas. The Vedas alone are responsible for teaching us about the nature of the self and brahman.

This aspect of Madhva's realist epistemology is important not only because it bolsters Madhva's claim that the atman and brahman are permanently distinct as revealed to us by experience, but because it means that the sacred texts must be read in consonance with the data we receive from our everyday experience, even though the Vedas present us with knowledge of a supra-sensible realm. Madhva argues that the Vedas cannot teach non-difference between the atman and brahman or a lack of true plurality since this would directly contradict our experience. In Madhva's view the sacred texts teach pancabheda, the five-fold difference between 1. Visnu and jivas 2. Visnu and jada 3. jiva and jada 4. one jiva and another and 5. one form of jada and another.

Madhva's belief in the innate difference of one soul from another led to some interesting doctrines in his system. He believed in a hierarchy of jivas, based upon their innate configurations of virtues (gunas) and faults (dosas). For example, Visnu is supreme because He possesses all qualities in their most fulfilled and perfect form. Furthermore, because Madhva believed that souls possess innate characteristics and capacities, he also maintained that they were predestined to achieve certain ends. This perspective put Madhva at odds with traditional Hindu views of the karma theory wherein differences in social and religious status are explained via past moral or immoral acts. For Madhva, each individual being possesses an innate moral propensity and karma is merely the mechanism by which a given soul is propelled towards his or her destiny.

4. Canonical Sources

Madhva's attempts to locate his controversial views in the canonical Vedanta texts often proved difficult. He is perhaps most famous for his idiosyncratic rendering of the Chandogya Upanisad's statement tat tvam asi or "you (the atman) are that (brahman)." By carrying over the 'a' from the preceding word, Madhva rendered the phrase atat tvam asi or "you are not that." Some scholars have speculated on "foreign," particularly Christian, influences on Madhva's thought but current scholarly consensus maintains that political and social changes in Madhva's region prompted a new approach to old religious convictions.

Madhva's Dvaita Vedanta is recognized as one of the three major schools of Vedanta (besides Sankara's Advaita and Ramanuja's Visistadvaita Vedanta). It has been further developed by such major figures as Jayatirtha (1356-1388) and Vyasaraya (1478-1589) and is kept alive by a still flourishing community [Madhva sampradaya] in India with its main center at Udipi (Karnataka).

5. References and Further Reading

  • Sharma, B. N. K. Philosophy of Sri Madhvacarya. Rev. ed. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass, 1986.
  • Sharma, B. N. K. Madhva's Teachings in His Own Words. Bombay: Bharatiya Vidya Bhavan, 1961.
  • Siauve, Suzanne. La Doctrine de Madhva. Pondicherry: Institut Francais d'Indologie, 1968.

Author Information

Valerie Stoker
Wright State University
U. S. A.

Marcus Aurelius (121—180 C.E.)

aureliuThe philosophy of the Roman Emperor Marcus Aurelius can be found in a collection of personal writings known as the Meditations. These reflect the influence of Stoicism and, in particular, the philosophy of Epictetus, the Stoic. The Meditations may be read as a series of practical philosophical exercises, following Epictetus' three topics of study, designed to digest and put into practice philosophical theory. Central to these exercises is a concern with the analysis of one's judgements and a desire to cultivate a "cosmic perspective."

From a modern perspective Marcus Aurelius is certainly not in the first rank of ancient philosophers. He is no Plato or Aristotle, nor even a Sextus Empiricus or Alexander of Aphrodisias. To a certain extent this judgement is perfectly fair and reasonable. However, in order to assess the philosophical qualities that Marcus does have and that are displayed in the Meditations it is necessary to emphasize that in antiquity philosophy was not conceived merely as a matter of theoretical arguments. Such arguments existed and were important, but they were framed within a broader conception of philosophy as a way of life. The aim was not merely to gain a rational understanding of the world but to allow that rational understanding to inform the way in which one lived. If one keeps this understanding of 'philosophy' in mind, then one becomes able to appreciate the function and the philosophical value of Marcus' Meditations.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. The Meditations
  3. Philosophy
    1. Stoicism
    2. The Influence of Epictetus
    3. The Three topoi
    4. Philosophical Exercises
    5. The Point of View of the Cosmos
  4. Concluding Remarks
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Life

Marcus Aurelius was born in 121 C.E.. His early education was overseen by the Emperor Hadrian, and he was later adopted by the Emperor Antoninus Pius in 138 C.E.. After an initial education in rhetoric undertaken by Fronto, Marcus later abandoned it in favor of philosophy. Marcus became Emperor himself in AD 161, initially alongside Lucius Verus, becoming sole Emperor in AD 169. Continual attacks meant that much of his reign was spent on campaign, especially in central Europe. However, he did find time to establish four Chairs of Philosophy in Athens, one for each of the principal philosophical traditions (Platonic, Aristotelian, Stoic, andEpicurean). He died in AD 180.

2. The Meditations

Marcus' reputation as a philosopher rests upon one work, the Meditations. The Meditations take the form of a personal notebook and were probably written while Marcus was on campaign in central Europe, c. AD 171-175. The entries appear to be in no particular order and may simply be in the original order of composition. The repetition of themes and the occasional groups of quotations from other authors (see e.g. Med. 4.46, 11.33-39)add to this impression. Book One, however, is somewhat different from the rest of the text and may well have been written separately (a plan for it may be discerned in Med. 6.48).

The first recorded mention of the Meditations is by Themistius in AD 364. The current Greek title - ta eis heauton ('to himself') – derives from a manuscript now lost and may be a later addition (it is first recorded c. AD 900 by Arethas). The modern text derives primarily from two sources: a manuscript now in the Vatican and a lost manuscript (mentioned above), upon which the first printed edition (1558) was based.

Beyond the Meditations there also survives part of a correspondence between Marcus and his rhetoric teacher Fronto, probably dating from earlier in Marcus' life (c. AD 138-166), discovered as a palimpsest in 1815. However, although this interesting discovery sheds some light on Marcus as an individual, it adds little to our understanding of his philosophy.

3. Philosophy

a. Stoicism

According to tradition, Marcus was a Stoic. His ancient biographer, Julius Capitolinus, describes him as such. Marcus also makes reference to a number of Stoics by whom he was taught and, in particular, mentions Rusticus from whom he borrowed a copy of the works of the Stoic philosopher Epictetus (Med. 1.7). However, nowhere in the Meditations does Marcus explicitly call himself a Stoic. This may simply reflect the likelihood that Marcus was writing only for himself rather than attempting to define himself to an audience. Yet it is probably fair to admit that Marcus was at least open to ideas from other philosophical traditions, being impressed by Stoic philosophy, but not merely an unthinking disciple of Stoicism.

b. The Influence of Epictetus

As has been noted, Marcus was clearly familiar with the Discourses of Epictetus, quoting them a number of times (see Med. 11.33-38). Epictetus' fame in the second century is noted by a number of ancient sources, being hailed as the greatest of the Stoics (Aulus Gellius 1.2.6) and more popular than Plato (Origen Contra Celsus 6.2). If Marcus felt drawn towards Stoicism, then Epictetus would surely have stood out as the most important Stoic of the time. It is perhaps reasonable, then, to turn to Epictetus in order to explore the philosophical background to the Meditations.

c. The Three topoi

Central to Epictetus' philosophy is his account of three topoi, or areas of study. He suggests that the apprentice philosopher should be trained in three distinct areas or topoi (see Epictetus Discourses 3.2.1-2):

  1. Desires (orexeis) and aversions (ekkliseis);
  2. Impulse to act (hormas) and not to act (aphormas);
  3. Freedom from deception, hasty judgement, and anything else related to assents (sunkatatheseis).

These three areas of training correspond to the three types of philosophical discourse referred to by earlier Stoics; the physical, the ethical, and the logical (see Diogenes Laertius 7.39). For Epictetus, it is not enough merely to discourse about philosophy. The student of philosophy should also engage in practical training designed to digest philosophical principals, transforming them into actions. Only this will enable the apprentice philosopher to transform himself into the Stoic ideal of a wise person or sage (sophos). It is to this end that the three topoi are directed.

The first topos, concerning desire (orexis), is devoted to physics. It is not enough for the philosopher to know how Nature works; he must train his desires in the light of that knowledge so that he only desires what is in harmony with Nature. For the Stoic, Nature is a complex inter-connected physical system, identified with God, of which the individual is but one part. What might be called the practical implication of this conception of Nature is that an individual will inevitably become frustrated and unhappy if they desire things without taking into account the operations of this larger physical system. Thus, in order to become a Stoic sage - happy and in harmony with Nature – one must train one's desires in the light of a study of Stoic physical theory.

The second topos, concerning impulse (hormê), is devoted to ethics. The study of ethical theory is of course valuable in its own right but, for the Stoic training to be a sage, these theories must be translated into ethical actions. In order to transform the way in which one behaves, it is necessary to train the impulses that shape one's behavior. By so doing the apprentice philosopher will be able not merely to say how a sage should act but also to act as a sage should act.

The third topos, concerning assent (sunkatathesis), is devoted to logic. It is important to remember here that for the Stoics the term 'logic' included not only dialectic but also much of what one would today call epistemology. According to Epictetus every impression (phantasia) that an individual receives often includes a value-judgement (hupolêpsis) made by the individual. When an individual accepts or gives assent (sunkatathesis) to an impression, assent is often given to the value-judgement as well. For instance, when one sees someone drink a lot of wine, one often judges that they are drinking too much wine (see e.g. Epictetus Handbook 45). Epictetus suggests that, in the light of Stoic epistemological theory, the apprentice philosopher should train himself to analyze his impressions carefully and be on guard not to give assent to unwarranted value-judgements.

For Epictetus, then, the student of philosophy must not only study the three types of philosophical discourse but also engage in these three types of philosophical training or exercise in order to translate that theory into actions. Marcus may himself be seen as a student of Epictetus, and so some scholars have suggested that the three topoi form a key to understanding the Meditations. Indeed, the Meditations may be approached as an example of a form of personal writing in which the very act of writing constituted a philosophical exercise designed to digest the three types of philosophical theory. In other words, the Meditations are a text produced by someone engaged in the three topoi outlined by Epictetus. This is hinted at in Med. 9.7 where Marcus exhorts himself to 'wipe out impression (phantasia), check impulse (hormê), and quench desire (orexis)'.

d. Philosophical Exercises

The Meditations certainly do not present philosophical theories similar to those that one can find in, say, the surviving works of Aristotle. Nor are they comparable to a theoretical treatise like the Elements of Ethics by the Stoic Hierocles, possibly a contemporary of Marcus. Nevertheless, the Meditations remain essentially a philosophical text. As has already been noted, the Meditations are a personal notebook, written by Marcus to himself and for his own use. They do not form a theoretical treatise designed to argue for a particular doctrine or conclusion; their function is different. In order to understand this function it is necessary to introduce the idea of a philosophical exercise (askêsis).

In the Meditations Marcus engages in a series of philosophical exercises designed to digest philosophical theories, to transform his character or 'dye his soul' in the light of those theories (see e.g. Med. 5.16), and so to transform his behavior and his entire way of life. By reflecting upon philosophical ideas and, perhaps more importantly, writing them down, Marcus engages in a repetitive process designed to habituate his mind into a new way of thinking. This procedure is quite distinct from the construction of philosophical arguments and has a quite different function. Whereas the former is concerned with creating a particular philosophical doctrine, the latter is a practical exercise or training designed to assimilate that doctrine into one's habitual modes of behavior. Following the account of three types of philosophical training outlined by Epictetus, Marcus reflects in the Meditations upon a medley of physical, ethical, and logical ideas. These written reflections constitute a second stage of philosophical education necessary after one has studied the philosophical theories (see e.g. Epictetus Discourses 1.26.3). By engaging in such written philosophical exercises Marcus attempts to transform his soul or inner disposition that will, in turn, alter his behavior. Thus, this second stage of philosophical education is the process by which a philosophical apprentice trains himself to put theories into practice, and so make progress towards wisdom.

e. The Point of View of the Cosmos

Of all the philosophical exercises in the Meditations the most prominent centers around what might be called 'the point of view of the cosmos'. In a number of passages Marcus exhorts himself to overcome the limited perspective of the individual and experience the world from a cosmic perspective. For example:

You have the power to strip away many superfluous troubles located wholly in your judgement, and to possess a large room for yourself embracing in thought the whole cosmos, to consider everlasting time, to think of the rapid change in the parts of each thing, of how short it is from birth until dissolution, and how the void before birth and that after dissolution are equally infinite. (Med. 9.32; see also 2.17, 5.23, 7.47, 12.32)

In passages such as this Marcus makes implicit reference to a number of Stoic theories. Here, for instance, the Stoic physics of flux inherited from Heraclitus is evoked. Perhaps more important though is the reference to one's judgement and the claim that this is the source of human unhappiness. Following Epictetus, Marcus claims that all attributions of good or evil are the product of human judgements. As Epictetus put it, what upsets people are not things themselves but rather their judgements about things (see Handbook 5). According to Epictetus' epistemological theory (to the extent that it can be reconstructed) the impressions that an individual receives and that appear to reflect the nature of things are in fact already composite. They involve not only a perception of some external object but also an almost involuntary and unconscious judgement about that perception. This judgement will be a product of one's preconceptions and mental habits. It is this composite impression to which an individual grants or denies assent, creating a belief. The task for the philosopher is to subject one's impressions to rigorous examination, making sure that one does not give assent to (i.e. accept as true) impressions that include any unwarranted value judgements.

Marcus' personal reflections in the Meditations may be read as a series of written exercises aimed at analyzing his own impressions and rejecting his own unwarranted value judgements. For instance, he reminds himself:

Do not say more to yourself than the first impressions report. […] Abide always by the first impressions and add nothing of your own from within. (Med. 8.49)

These 'first impressions' are impressions before a value judgement has been made. For Marcus, human well-being or happiness (eudaimonia) is entirely dependent upon correctly examining one's impressions and judgements. For once one has overcome false value-judgements - that wealth and social standing are valuable and that one should compete for them against others, for instance –one will experience the cosmos as a single living being (identified with God) rather than a site of conflict and destruction. As Cicero put it in his summary of Stoic physics:

The various limited modes of being may encounter many external obstacles to hinder their perfect realization, but there can be nothing that can frustrate Nature as a whole, since she embraces and contains within herself all modes of being. (On the Nature of the Gods 2.35)

It is to this end - cultivating an experience of the cosmos as a unified living being identified with God– that the philosophical exercises in the Meditations are directed.

4. Concluding Remarks

From a modern perspective Marcus Aurelius is certainly not in the first rank of ancient philosophers. He is no Plato or Aristotle, nor even a Sextus Empiricus or Alexander of Aphrodisias. To a certain extent this judgement is perfectly fair and reasonable. However, in order to assess the philosophical qualities that Marcus does have and that are displayed in the Meditations it is necessary to emphasize that in antiquity philosophy was not conceived merely as a matter of theoretical arguments. Such arguments existed and were important, but they were framed within a broader conception of philosophy as a way of life. The aim was not merely to gain a rational understanding of the world but to allow that rational understanding to inform the way in which one lived. If one keeps this understanding of 'philosophy' in mind, then one becomes able to appreciate the function and the philosophical value of Marcus' Meditations.

5. References and Further Reading

1. Selected Editions and Translations of the Meditations

  • CROSSLEY, H., The Fourth Book of the Meditations of Marcus Aurelius Antoninus, A Revised Text with Translation and Commentary (London: Macmillan, 1882) - an excellent commentary, sadly of only one book.
  • DALFEN, J., Marci Aurelii Antonini Ad Se Ipsum Libri XII, Bibliotheca Scriptorum Graecorum et Romanorum Teubneriana (Leipzig: Teubner, 1979; 2nd edn 1987) - includes an invaluable word index.
  • FARQUHARSON, A. S. L., The Meditations of the Emperor Marcus Antoninus, Edited with Translation and Commentary, 2 vols (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1944) - arguably the definitive edition and essential for any serious study of the Meditations.
  • FARQUHARSON, A. S. L.,The Meditations of Marcus Aurelius Antoninus, With Introduction and Notes by R. B. Rutherford (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1989) - an edition reprinting only the translation from Farquharson's 1944 edition, but supplemented with a helpful introduction and a selection from the correspondence with Fronto.
  • GATAKER, T., Marci Antonini Imperatoris de rebus suis, sive de eis qae ad se pertinere censebat, Libri XII (Cambridge: Thomas Buck, 1652) - a justly famous early edition of the Meditations containing a substantial commentary.
  • HAINES, C. R., The Communings with Himself of Marcus Aurelius Antoninus, A Revised Text and a Translation into English, The Loeb Classical Library (London: Heinemann, 1916; later reprints by Harvard University Press) - probably the most readily available edition of the Greek text, with a facing English translation. Haines also prepared a two-volume edition of the correspondence with Fronto for the Loeb Classical Library.
  • LEOPOLD, I. H., M. Antoninus Imperator Ad Se Ipsum, Scriptorum Classicorum Bibliotheca Oxoniensis (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1908) - the OCT edition, now out of print.
  • THEILER, W., Kaiser Marc Aurel, Wege Zu Sich Selbst (Zürich: Artemis, 1951) - a widely praised edition of the Greek text, with a facing German translation.

2. Selected Studies

  • AFRICA, T. W., 'The Opium Addiction of Marcus Aurelius', Journal of the History of Ideas 22 (1961), 97-102.
  • ARNOLD, E. V., Roman Stoicism: Being Lectures on the History of the Stoic Philosophy with Special Reference to its Development within the Roman Empire (Cambridge, 1911; repr. London: Routledge & Kegan Paul, 1958)
  • ASMIS, E., 'The Stoicism of Marcus Aurelius', ANRW II 36.3 (1989), pp. 2228-2252.
  • BIRLEY, A. R., Marcus Aurelius: A Biography (London: Batsford, 1966; new edn Routledge 2000)
  • BRUNT, P. A., 'Marcus Aurelius in his Meditations', Journal of Roman Studies 64 (1974), 1-20.
  • CLARKE, M. L., The Roman Mind: Studies in the History of Thought from Cicero to Marcus Aurelius (London: Cohen & West, 1956)
  • HADOT, P., 'Une clé des Pensées de Marc Aurèle: les trois topoi philosophiques selon Épictète', Les Études philosophiques 1 (1978), 65-83.
  • HADOT, P., The Inner Citadel: The Meditations of Marcus Aurelius, trans. M. Chase (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1998); a translation of La Citadelle Intérieure (Paris, 1992)
  • KRAYE, J., 'Ethnicorum omnium sanctissimus: Marcus Aurelius and his Meditations from Xylander to Diderot', in J. Kraye & M. W. F. Stones, eds, Humanism and Early Modern Philosophy (London: Routledge, 2000), pp. 107-134.
  • LONG, A. A., 'Epictetus, Marcus Aurelius', in T. J. Luce, ed., Ancient Writers: Greece and Rome (New York: Scribner's, 1982), pp. 985-1002.
  • MORFORD, M., The Roman Philosophers: From the Time of Cato the Censor to the Death of Marcus Aurelius (London: Routledge, 2002)
  • NEWMAN, R. J., 'Cotidie meditare: Theory and Practice of the meditatio in Imperial Stoicism', ANRW II 36.3 (1989), pp. 1473-1517.
  • RIST, J. M., 'Are You a Stoic? The Case of Marcus Aurelius', in B. F. Meyers & E. P. Sanders, eds, Jewish and Christian Self-Definition 3 (London: SCM, 1982), pp. 23-45.
  • RUTHERFORD, R. B., The Meditations of Marcus Aurelius: A Study (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1989)
  • STANTON, G. R., 'The Cosmopolitan Ideas of Epictetus and Marcus Aurelius', Phronesis 13 (1968), 183-195.
  • WICKHAM LEGG, J., 'A Bibliography of the Thoughts of Marcus Aurelius Antoninus', Transactions of the Bibliographical Society 10 (1908-09, but publ. 1910), 15-81.

Author Information

John Sellars
Email: john.sellars (at)
University of the West of England
United Kingdom

Origen of Alexandria (185—254 C.E.)

OrigenOrigen of Alexandria, one of the greatest Christian theologians,  is famous for composing the seminal work of Christian Neoplatonism, his treatise On First Principles. Origen lived through a turbulent period of the Christian Church, when persecution was wide-spread and little or no doctrinal consensus existed among the various regional churches. In this environment, Gnosticism flourished, and Origen was the first truly philosophical thinker to turn his hand not only to a refutation of Gnosticism, but to offer an alternative Christian system that was more rigorous and philosophically respectable than the mythological speculations of the various Gnostic sects. Origen was also an astute critic of the pagan philosophy of his era, yet he also learned much from it, and adapted its most useful and edifying teachings to a grand elucidation of the Christian faith. Porphyry (the illustrious student of Plotinus), though a tenacious adversary of Christianity, nevertheless grudgingly admitted Origen's mastery of the Greek philosophical tradition. Although Origen did go on to compose numerous biblical commentaries and sermons, his importance for the history of philosophy rests mainly on two works, the systematic treatise On First Principles, and his response to the pagan philosopher Celsus' attack on Christianity, the treatise Against Celsus. Since the purpose of this article is to introduce students and interested laypersons to the philosophy of Origen, it will be necessary to focus mainly on the treatise On First Principles, which is the most systematic and philosophical of Origen's numerous writings. In this work Origen establishes his main doctrines, including that of the Holy Trinity (based upon standard Middle Platonic triadic emanation schemas); the pre-existence and fall of souls; multiple ages and transmigration of souls; and the eventual restoration of all souls to a state of dynamic perfection in proximity to the godhead. He is unique among Platonists of his era for introducing history into his cosmological and metaphysical speculations, and his insistence on the absolute freedom of each and every soul, thereby denying the fatalism that so often found its way into the more esoteric teachings of the various philosophical and mystery schools of his day.

Table of Contents

  1. Origen's Life and Times
  2. His Intellectual Heritage: Pagan, Jewish and Christian
  3. The Philosophical System of Origen
    1. The Trinity
    2. Souls and their Fall
    3. Multiple Ages, Metempsychosis, and the Restoration of All
  4. Important Themes in Origen's Philosophy
    1. Free Will
    2. Education and History
    3. Eternal Motion of Souls
  5. Origen's Importance in the History of Philosophy
    1. Hellenistic Philosophy
    2. Christianity
  6. Concluding Summary
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Origen's Life and Times

Origen was, according to Eusebius, "not quite seventeen" when Septimius Severus' persecution of the Christians began "in the tenth year of [his] reign," (Ecclesiastical History; tr. Williamson, p. 179) which gives the approximate date of Origen's birth as 185/6 C.E. He died around the reign of Gallus, which places his death in 254/5 C.E. Origen lived during a turbulent period of the Roman Empire, when the barbarian invasions were sweeping across Europe, threatening the stability of the Roman Empire. His was also a time of periodic persecution against Christians, notably during the reigns of the Emperors Severus, Maximin, and Decius, so that Origen's life began and ended with persecution.

His family was devoutly Christian, and likely highly educated; for his father, who died a martyr, made sure that Origen was schooled not only in biblical studies, but in Hellenistic education as well. Eusebius (Ecclesiastical History, tr. Williamson, p. 182) tells us that Origen was only seventeen when he took over as Headmaster (didaskalos) of the Christian Catechetical School at Alexandria. He became interested in Greek philosophy quite early in his life, studying for a while under Ammonius Saccas (the teacher of Plotinus) and amassing a large collection of philosophical texts. It is probably around this time that he began composing On First Principles. However, as he became ever more devoted to the Christian faith, he sold his library, abandoning, for a time, any contact with pagan Greek wisdom, though he would eventually return to secular studies (Greek philosophy), from which he derived no small measure of inspiration, as Porphyry (recorded in Eusebius) makes quite clear, as he continued with his ever more sophisticated elucidation of biblical texts.

2. His Intellectual Heritage: Pagan, Jewish and Christian

Origen's debt to Holy Scripture is obvious; he quotes the bible at great length, often drawing together seemingly disparate passages to make a profound theological point. Yet his thought is all the while informed by his Greek philosophical education, specifically that of the Middle Platonic tradition, notably the works of the Jewish Platonist Philo of Alexandria and the Neopythagorean philosopher Numenius of Apamea (fl. 150-176 C.E.). Origen shares with Philo an insistence on the free will of the person, a freedom that is direct evidence of humanity's likeness to God - for, like God's Being, human existence is free from all necessity. From Numenius, Origen likely adopted the conception of a "second god" proceeding from a first, ineffable being called the One, "First God," or Father. Numenius referred to this "second god" as Demiurge or craftsman, and taught that he created the cosmos by imitating the intellectual content of the "First God." Origen applied this basic notion to his doctrine of Christ, whom he also called Demiurge (Commentary on John 1.22), and went on to describe Christ as a reflection of the Truth of the Father, stating that compared to human beings Christ is Truth, but compared to the Father He is falsehood (Jerome, Epistle 92, quoting Origen; see also On First Principles 1.2.6).

Another extremely important part of Origen's intellectual heritage is the concept of apokatastasis or "restoration of all things." This term first appears, as a philosophical concept, in the writings of the Stoics, whose materialistic pantheism led them to identify Zeus with the pure, "craftsmanly" fire pervading and constituting the cosmos. According to the Stoics, this fire expands and contracts according to a fixed cycle. They called the contraction a "conflagration" (ekpurôsis), destroying the cosmos, yet only temporarily. This contraction was described as Zeus returning to his own thoughts, to contemplate the eternal perfection of his mind/cosmos (the material cosmos being the expression of his mind, or Logos). The expansion would occur when Zeus once again expressed his mind in the creation of the material cosmos; this re-creation or reconstitution of the cosmos is what the Stoics called apokatastasis. Some Stoics argued that since Zeus is perfect mind, then every reconstitution of the cosmos will resemble identically the one that preceded it. This Stoic doctrine was to have an immense influence on the development of the so-called esoteric traditions in the Hellenistic era, notably the Hermetic school, Gnosticism, and astrology, with all of which Origen was, in varying degrees, familiar.

In Origen's time, Christianity as a religion had not yet developed a system of theology as a basis of orthodoxy; therefore, in addition to a wide variety of opinions regarding the faith, there were also various sects, each claiming to possess the truth of the Christian faith. Foremost among these sects was the group of schools loosely labelled 'gnostic.' The Valentinian school (founded by Valentinus, an outstanding teacher and philosopher who was at one point a candidate for bishop of Rome) was the most philosophically accomplished of the Christian Gnostic sects. In his Commentary on John, Origen refutes the doctrines of a Valentinian Gnostic named Heracleon, who had earlier written a commentary on the same Gospel. While Origen's opposition to Gnosticism precluded any doctrinal influence, he saw in Gnosticism the value of a system, for it was precisely by virtue of their elaborate and self-consistent systems that the Gnostics were successful in gaining adherents. Since there were no non-Gnostic Christian theological systems in his day, it was up to Origen to formulate one. This was the program of his treatise On First Principles.

3. The Philosophical System of Origen

Origen was the first systematic theologian and philosopher of the Christian Church. Earlier Christian intellectuals had confined themselves to apologetic and moralizing works; notable among such writers is Clement of Alexandria (d. 215 C.E.), who, like Origen, found much of value in Hellenic philosophy. Before proceeding with an examination of Origen's system, it must be noted that scholars are divided over the question of whether or not his On First Principles contains a system. Henri Crouzel (1989), for example, has argued that the presence of contradictory statements in certain portions of the treatise, as well as in other texts, is proof against the claim that Origen was presenting a system. Hans Jonas (1974), on the other hand, recognized a clear system in On First Principles and gave a convincing elucidation of such. The reason for this scholarly divide is mostly due to the lack of a precise definition of 'system' and 'systematic'. If one approaches Origen's text expecting a carefully worked-out system of philosophy in the manner of a Kant or a Hegel, one will be disappointed. However, if one reads the text with an eye for prominent themes and inner consistency of such themes with one another, a system does emerge. As John Dillon has pointed out, Origen succeeded in luring away several students of the renowned Platonic teacher Ammonius Saccas to study with him, and, Dillon convincingly observes, this would not have been possible if Origen did not have some system to offer (Dillon, in Kannengiesser, Petersen, ed. 1988, p. 216, and footnote). It must also be pointed out that the text of On First Principles that we possess is not complete. Origen's original Greek is preserved only in fragments, the remainder of the text is extant only in a Latin translation by Rufinus, who was a defender of Origen against posthumous charges of heresy. While Rufinus' translation is, as far as we can tell, faithful in most respects, there is ample evidence that he softened certain potentially troublesome passages in an ill-guided attempt to redeem his beloved teacher. When reading Origen's treatise, then, one would do well to keep this in mind should one stumble across seemingly contradictory passages, for one has no way of knowing what the original Greek might have said.

a. The Trinity

Origen begins his treatise On First Principles by establishing, in typical Platonic fashion, a divine hierarchical triad; but instead of calling these principles by typical Platonic terms like monad, dyad, and world-soul, he calls them "Father," "Christ," and "Holy Spirit," though he does describe these principles using Platonic language. The first of these principles, the Father, is a perfect unity, complete unto Himself, and without body - a purely spiritual mind. Since God the Father is, for Origen, "personal and active," it follows that there existed with Him, always, an entity upon which to exercise His intellectual activity. This entity is Christ the Son, the Logos, or Wisdom (Sophia), of God, the first emanation of the Father, corresponding to Numenius' "second god," as we have seen above (section 2). The third and last principle of the divine triad is the Holy Spirit, who "proceeds from the Son and is related to Him as the Son is related to the Father" (A. Tripolitis 1978, p. 94). Here is Origen explaining the status of the Holy Spirit, in a passage preserved in the original Greek:

The God and Father, who holds the universe together, is superior to every being that exists, for he imparts to each one from his own existence that which each one is; the Son, being less than the Father, is superior to rational creatures alone (for he is second to the Father); the Holy Spirit is still less, and dwells within the saints alone. So that in this way the power of the Father is greater than that of the Son and of the Holy Spirit, and that of the Son is more than that of the Holy Spirit, and in turn the power of the Holy Spirit exceeds that of every other holy being (Fragment 9 [Koetschau] tr. Butterworth 1966, pp. 33-34, and footnote).

This graded hierarchy reveals an allotment of power to the second and third members of the Trinity: the Father's power is universal, but the Son's corresponds only to rational creatures, while the Spirit's power corresponds strictly to the "saints" or those who have achieved salvation. Such a structure of divine influence on the created realm is found much later in the system of the Neoplatonic philosopher Proclus (see J. Dillon, in G. Vesey, ed. 1989).

b. Souls and their Fall

According to Origen, God's first creation was a collectivity of rational beings which he calls logika. "Although Origen speaks of the logika as being created, they were not created in time. Creation with respect to them means that they had a beginning, but not a temporal one" (Tripolitis 1978, p. 94). Further, Origen explains that the number of these rational beings is necessarily limited, since an infinite creation would be incomprehensible, and unworthy of God. These souls were originally created in close proximity to God, with the intention that they should explore the divine mysteries in a state of endless contemplation. They grew weary of this intense contemplation, however, and lapsed, falling away from God and into an existence on their own terms, apart from the divine presence and the wisdom to be found there. This fall was not, it must be understood, the result of any inherent imperfection in the creatures of God, rather, it was the result of a misuse of the greatest gift of God to His creation: freedom. The only rational creature who escaped the fall and remained with God is the "soul of Christ" (Origen, On First Principles 2.6.5; Tripolitis 1978, p. 96). This individual soul is indicative of the intended function of all souls, i.e., to reveal the divine mystery in unique ways, insofar as the meaning of this mystery is deposited within them, as theandric (God-human) potentiality, to be drawn out and revealed through co-operation with God (On First Principles 2.9.2-8). As Origen explains, the soul of Christ was no different from that of any of the souls that fell away from God, for Christ's soul possessed the same potential for communion with God as that of all other souls. What distinguished the soul of Christ from all others - and what preserved Him from falling away - was His supreme act of free choice, to remain immersed in the divinity.

What are now souls (psukhê) began as minds, and through boredom or distraction grew "cold" (psukhesthai) as they moved away from the "divine warmth" (On First Principles 2.8.3). Thus departing from God, they came to be clothed in bodies, at first of "a fine ethereal and invisible nature," but later, as souls fell further away from God, their bodies changed "from a fine, ethereal and invisible body to a body of a coarser and more solid state. The purity and subtleness of the body with which a soul is enveloped depends upon the moral development and perfection of the soul to which it is joined. Origen states that there are varying degrees of subtleness even among the celestial and spiritual bodies" (Tripolitis 1978, p. 106). When a soul achieves salvation, according to Origen, it ceases being a soul, and returns to a state of pure "mind" or understanding. However, due to the fall, now "no rational spirit can ever exist without a body" (Tripolitis 1978, p. 114), but the bodies of redeemed souls are "spiritual bodies," made of the purest fire (see A. Scott 1991, Chapter 9).

c. Multiple Ages, Metempsychosis, and the Restoration of All

Origen did not believe in the eternal suffering of sinners in hell. For him, all souls, including the devil himself, will eventually achieve salvation, even if it takes innumerable ages to do so; for Origen believed that God's love is so powerful as to soften even the hardest heart, and that the human intellect - being the image of God - will never freely choose oblivion over proximity to God, the font of Wisdom Himself. Certain critics of Origen have claimed that this teaching undermines his otherwise firm insistence on free will, for, these critics argue, the souls must maintin the freedom to ultimately reject or accept God, or else free will becomes a mere illusion. What escapes these critics is the fact that Origen's conception of free will is not our own; he considered freedom in the Platonic sense of the ability to choose the good. Since evil is not the polar opposite of good, but rather simply the absence of good - and thus having no real existence - then to 'choose' evil is not to make a conscious decision, but to act in ignorance of the measure of all rational decision, i.e., the good. Origen was unable to conceive of a God who would create souls that were capable of dissolving into the oblivion of evil (non-being) for all eternity. Therefore, he reasoned that a single lifetime is not enough for a soul to achieve salvation, for certain souls require more education or 'healing' than others. So he developed his doctrine of multiple ages, in which souls would be re-born, to experience the educative powers of God once again, with a view to ultimate salvation. This doctrine, of course, implies some form of transmigration of souls or metempsychosis. Yet Origen's version of metempsychosis was not the same as that of the Pythagoreans, for example, who taught that the basest of souls will eventually become incarnated as animals. For Origen, some sort of continuity between the present body, and the body in the age to come, was maintained (Jerome, Epistle to Avitus 7, quoting Origen; see also Commentary on Matthew 11.17). Origen did not, like many of his contemporaries, degrade the body to the status of an unwanted encrustation imprisoning the soul; for him, the body is a necessary principle of limitation, providing each soul with a unique identity. This is an important point for an understanding of Origen's epistemology, which is based upon the idea that God educates each soul according to its inherent abilities, and that the abilities of each soul will determine the manner of its knowledge. We may say, then, that the uniqueness of the soul's body is an image of its uniqueness of mind. This is the first inkling of the development of the concept of the person and personality in the history of Western thought.

The restoration of all beings (apokatastasis) is the most important concept in Origen's philosophy, and the touchstone by which he judges all other theories. His concept of universal restoration is based on equally strong Scriptural and Hellenistic philosophical grounds and is not original, as it can be traced back to Heraclitus, who stated that "the beginning and end are common" (Fragment B 103, tr. J. Barnes 1987, p. 115). Considering that Origen's later opponents based their charges of heresy largely on this aspect of his teaching, it is surprising to see how well-grounded in scripture this doctrine really is. Origen's main biblical proof-text is 1 Corinthians 15:25-28, especially verse 28, which speaks of the time "when all things shall be subdued unto him [Christ], then shall the Son also himself be subject unto him that put all things under him, that God may be all in all" (KJV, my emphasis). This scriptural notion of God being "all in all" (panta en pasin) is a strong theological support for his theory of apokatastasis. There are, of course, numerous other passages in scripture that contradict this notion, but we must remember that Origen's strength resided in his philosophical ability to use reason and dialectic in support of humane doctrines, not in the ability to use scripture in support of dogmatical and anti-humanistic arguments. Origen imagined salvation not in terms of the saved rejoicing in heaven and the damned suffering in hell, but as a reunion of all souls with God.

4. Important Themes in Origen's Philosophy

While Origen's lengthy treatise On First Principles contains numerous discussions of a wide variety of issues relevant to the Christianity of his day, as well as to broader philosophical concerns, certain key themes do emerge that are of universal and timeless value for philosophy. These themes are: free will; the educational value of history; and the infinity and eternal motion (becoming) of human beings.

a. Free Will

Origen's conception of freedom, as discussed above, was not the same as modern conceptions. This is not to say that his conception was wrong, of course. For Origen recognized freedom only in reason, in rationality, which is precisely the ability to recognize and embrace the good, which is for him God. Irrationality is ignorance, the absence of a conception of the good. The ignorant person cannot be held responsible for his ignorance, except to the extent that he has been lazy, not applying himself to the cultivation of reason. The moral dimension of this conception of freedom is that ignorance is not to be punished, but remedied through education. Punishment, understood in the punative sense, is of no avail and will even lead to deeper ignorance and sin, as the punished soul grows resentful, not understanding why he is being punished. Origen firmly believed that the knowledge of the good (God) is itself enough to remove all taint of sin and ignorance from souls. A 'freedom' to embrace evil (the absence of good) would have made no sense to Origen who, as a Platonist, identified evil with enslavement and goodness with freedom. The soul who has seen the good, he argued, will not fall into ignorance again, for the good is inspiring and worthy of eternal contemplation (see Commentary on Romans 5.10.15).

b. Education and History

Origen may rightfully be called the first philosopher of history, for, like Hegel, he understood history as a process involving the participation of persons in grand events leading to an eventual culmination or 'end of history'. Unlike mainstream Christian eschatology, Origen did not understand the end of history as the final stage of a grand revelation of God, but rather as the culmination of a human-divine (co-operative) process, in which the image and likeness of God (humanity) is re-united with its source and model, God Himself (see Against Celsus 4.7; On First Principles 2.11.5, 2.11.7; Tripolitis 1978, p. 111). This is accomplished through education of souls who, having fallen away from God, are now sundered from the divine presence and require a gradual re-initiation into the mysteries of God. Such a reunion must not be accomplished by force, for God will never, Origen insists, undermine the free will of His creatures; rather, God will, over the course of numerous ages if need be, educate souls little by little, leading them eventually, by virtue of their own growing responsiveness, back to Himself, where they will glory in the uncovering of the infinite mysteries of the eternal godhead (On First Principles 2.11.6-7).

c. Eternal Motion of Souls

A common motif in Platonism during, before, and after Origen's time is salvific stasis, or the idea that the soul will achieve complete rest and staticity when it finally ascends to a contemplation of the good. We notice this idea early on in Plato, who speaks in the Republic (517c-d, 519c-e) of a state of pure contemplation from which the philosopher is only wrenched by force or persuasion. In Origen's own time, Plotinus developed his notion of an 'about-face' (epistrophê) of the soul resulting in an instant union of the soul with its divine principle, understood as an idealized, changeless form of contemplation, allowing for no dynamism or personal development (see Enneads 4.3.32, 4.8.4, for example). Influenced indirectly by Plotinus, and more directly by later Neoplatonists (both Christian and pagan), the Christian theologian St. Maximus the Confessor elaborated a systematic philosophical theology culminating in an eschatology in which the unique human person was replaced by the overwhelming, transcendent presence of God (see Chapters on Knowledge 2.88). Origen managed to maintain the transcendentality of God on the one hand, and the dynamic persistence of souls in being on the other. He did this by defining souls not by virtue of their intellectual content (or, in the Plotinian sense, for example, by virtue of their 'prior' or higher, constitutive principle) but rather by their ability to engage in a finite manner with the infinite God. This engagement is constitutive of the soul's existence, and guarantees its uniqueness. Each soul engages uniquely with God in contemplating divine mysteries according to its innate ability, and this engagement persists for all eternity, for the mysteries of the godhead are inexhaustible, as is the enthusiastic application of the souls' intellectual ability.

5. Origen's Importance in the History of Philosophy

Throughout this article, Origen's importance has largely been linked to his melding of philosophical insights with elucidations of various aspects of the Christian fatih. Yet his importance for Hellenistic philosophy is marked, and though not quite as pervasive as his influence on Christian thought, is nevertheless worth a few brief remarks. His role in the formation of Christian doctrine is more prominent, yet, because of its problematical nature, will be treated of only briefly.

a. Hellenistic Philosophy

Origen's debt to Hellenistic (Greek) philosophy is quite obvious; his influence on the development of later pagan philosophy is - at least from the perspective of most contemporary scholarship - rather less obvious, but it is there. His trinitarian doctrine, for example, consisted of a gradation of influence beginning with the Father, whose influence was of the most general, universal kind, binding together all things; the influence of the Son extended strictly to sentient beings; the Holy Spirit's influence extended only to the 'elect' or saints who had already achieved salvation (Dillon, in D.J. O'Meara, ed., 1982, p. 20; see also On First Principles 1.3.5). This conception found later expression in Proclus' Elements of Theology (Proposition 57), where he elucidates this formulation: "Every cause both operates prior to its consequent and gives rise to a greater number of posterior terms" (tr. Dodds). For Origen, the pre-existent souls, through their fall, gave rise to a history over which both the Father and the Son came to preside, while the Holy Spirit only enters into human reality to effect a salvific re-orientation toward God that is already the result of an achieved history. The Holy Spirit, then, may be understood as the final cause, the preparatory causes of which are the Father and Son, the mutual begetters of history. A bit later, the pagan philosopher Iamblichus reversed this Origenian notion, claiming that the influence of the divine became stronger and more concentrated the further it penetrated into created reality, extending in its pure power even to stones and plants. In this sense, the Holy Spirit, limited as it is (according to Origen) to interaction with the saints alone, gives way to the universal power of the Father, which extends to the furthest reaches of reality. Iamblichus saw no reason to divide the divinity into persons or emanative effects; rather, he saw the divinity as operative, in varying degrees, at every level of reality. At the lowest level, however, this power is most effective, imparting power to plants and stones, and providing support for the theurgical practice advocated by Iamblichus (Olympiodorus, Commentary on Alcibiades I, 115A; Psellus, Chaldaean Expositions 1153a10-11; Dillon, ed. O'Meara 1982, p. 23).

b. Christianity

Origen's ideas, most notably those in the treatise On First Principles, gave rise to a movement in the Christian Church known as Origenism. From the third through the sixth centuries this movement was quite influential, especially among the monastics, and was given articulate - if excessively codified form - by the theologian Evagrius Ponticus (c. 345-400 C.E.). It is to be noted that the spirit of philosophical inquiry exemplified by Origen was largely absent from the movement bearing his name. A far more creative use of Origen's concepts and themes was made by Gregory of Nyssa (d. ca. 386 C.E.), who adopted Origen's doctrine of apokatastasis or "restoration of all things." Gregory was also responsible for articulating more clearly than did Origen the notion that redeemed souls will remain in a state of dynamic intellectual activity (see Gregory of Nyssa, Catechetical Oration, esp. Chapters 26 and 35). After the posthumous condemnation of Origen (and Origenism) in the fifth century, it became increasingly difficult for mainstream theologians to make use of his work. Pseudo-Dionysius the Areopagite (5th or 6th Century C.E.) drew upon Neoplatonic philosophy, especially Proclus (411-485 C.E.) and Iamblichus (ca. 240-325 C.E.), and though he followed in Origen's footsteps in this use of pagan wisdom, he never mentioned his predecessor by name. In the seventh century, Maximus the Confessor (ca. 580-662), who may be called the last great Christian Neoplatonist, set about revising Origen's doctrines in a manner more acceptable to the theological climate of the early Byzantine Church. Maximus changed the historicism of Origen into a more introspective, personal struggle to attain the divine vision through asceticism and prayer, the result being a total subsumption of the person by the godhead. This was Maximus' vision of salvation: the replacement of the ego by the divine presence (see L. Thunberg 1985, p. 89; also Maximus, Chapters on Knowledge 2.88). While there is much that may be called brilliant and even inspiring in Maximus' philosophical theology, this loss of the centrality of the person - as unique, unrepeatable entity - in the cosmic process of salvation led to the loss of a sense of co-operation of humanity and God, and sapped Christianity of the intellectual vigor that it displayed in the period leading up to the establishment of a theocratical Byzantine state.

Thankfully, Origen's legacy was not lost. He was an inspiration to the Renaissance Humanists and, more recently, to certain Existentialist Christian theologians, notably Nicolas Berdyaev (1874-1948) whose insistence on the absolute autonomy and nobility of the person in the face of all objectifying reality is an echo across the ages of the humanism of Origen. Berdyaev himself admits Origen's influence on his thought (as well as that of Gregory of Nyssa) and insists that the doctrine of hell and the eternal suffering of sinners is not compatible with authentic Christianity. He also places a great importance on history, and even broaches a modern, de-mythologized conception of metempsychosis in terms of a universal, shared history of which all persons are a part, regardless of their temporal specificity. History, according to Berdyaev (and in this he follows Origen) binds all of humanity together. No soul will be saved in isolation; all must be saved together, or not be saved at all. Berdyaev wrote numerous works, a few of the most important are Slavery and Freedom (Eng. tr. 1944), The Beginning and the End(Eng. tr.1952), and Truth and Revelation (Eng. tr. 1962).

6. Concluding Summary

Origen was an innovator in an era when innovation, for Christians, was a luxury ill-afforded. He drew upon pagan philosophy in an effort to elucidate the Christian faith in a manner acceptable to intellectuals, and he succeeded in converting many gifted pagan students of philosophy to his faith. He was also a great humanist, who believed that all creatures will eventually achieve salvation, including the devil himself. Origen did not embrace the dualism of Gnosticism, nor that of the more primitive expressions of the Christian faith still extant in his day. Rather, he took Christianity to a higher level, finding in it a key to the perfection of the intellect or mind, which is what all souls are in their pure form. The restoration of all souls to a purely intellectual existence was Origen's faith, and his philosophy was based upon such a faith. In this, he is an heir to Socrates and Plato, but he also brought a new conception into philosophy - that of the creative aspect of the soul, as realized in history, the culmination of which is salvation, after which follows an eternal delving into the deep mysteries of God.

7. References and Further Reading


Selected Works by Origen in English Translation

  • Origen, Against Celsus, tr. F. Crombie (The Ante-Nicene Fathers 4; Michigan: Eerdmans 1979, reprint).
  • Origen, On First Principles, tr. G.W. Butterworth (New York: Harper and Row 1966).
  • Origen, Commentary on John, tr. A. Menzies (The Ante-Nicene Fathers 10; Michigan: Eerdmans 1978, reprint).
  • Origen, Commentary on Matthew, tr. J. Patrick (The Ante-Nicene Fathers 10; Michigan: Eerdmans 1978, reprint).
  • Origen, Commentary on the Epistle to the Romans (Books 1-5), tr. T.P. Scheck (Washington, D.C.: The Catholic University of America Press 2001).
  • Origen, Commentary on the Epistle to the Romans (Books 6-10), tr. T.P. Scheck (Washington, D.C.: The Catholic University of America Press 2002).

Other Sources

  • Berdyaev, Nicholas, The Beginning and the End, tr. R.M. French (New York: Harper and Brothers 1952).
  • Berdyaev, Nicholas, Slavery and Freedom, tr. R.M. French (New York: Charles Scribner's Sons 1944).
  • Berdyaev, Nicholas, Truth and Revelation, tr. R.M. French (New York: Collier Books 1962).
  • Chadwick, H., Early Christian Thought and the Classical Tradition: Studies in Justin, Clement, and Origen (New York: Oxford University Press 1966).
  • Crouzel, H., Origen: The Life and Thought of the First Great Theologian, tr. A.S. Worrall (T.&T. Clark Ltd. 1989).
  • Dillon, J.M., The Middle Platonists(Ithaca: Cornell University Press 1977).
  • Hardy, E.R., Christology of the Later Fathers (Philadelphia: The Westminster Press 1954).
  • Jonas, H., "Origen's Metaphysics of Free Will, Fall, and Salvation: A 'Divine Comedy' of the Universe," in Philosophical Essays: From Ancient Creed to Technological Man (Englewood Cliffs, NJ: PrenticeHall 1974).
  • Kannengiesser, C., Petersen, W.L., eds., Origen of Alexandria: His World and His Legacy (Indiana: University of Notre Dame Press 1988).
  • Kelly, J.N.D., Early Christian Doctrines (New York: Harper and Row 1978).
  • Louth, A., Maximus the Confessor (New York: Routledge 1996).
  • Luibheid, C., Rorem, P., tr., Pseudo-Dionysius: The Complete Works (Mahwah, NJ: Paulist Press 1987).
  • Meyendorff, J., Christ in Eastern Christian Thought (Crestwood: St. Vladimir's Seminary Press 1975).
  • Murphy, F.X., "Evagrius Ponticus and Origenism," in R. Hanson and H. Crouzel, ed., Origeniana Tertia (1981).
  • O'Meara, D.J., ed., Neoplatonism and Christian Thought (New York: State University of New York Press 1982).
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Author Information

Edward Moore
St. Elias School of Orthodox Theology
U. S. A.


Neo-platonism (or Neoplatonism) is a modern term used to designate the period of Platonic philosophy beginning with the work of Plotinus and ending with the closing of the Platonic Academy by the Emperor Justinian in 529 C.E. This brand of Platonism, which is often described as 'mystical' or religious in nature, developed outside the mainstream of Academic Platonism. The origins of Neoplatonism can be traced back to the era of Hellenistic syncretism which spawned such movements and schools of thought as Gnosticism and the Hermetic tradition. A major factor in this syncretism, and one which had an immense influence on the development of Platonic thought, was the introduction of the Jewish Scriptures into Greek intellectual circles via the translation known as the Septuagint. The encounter between the creation narrative of Genesis and the cosmology of Plato's Timaeus set in motion a long tradition of cosmological theorizing that finally culminated in the grand schema of Plotinus' Enneads. Plotinus' two major successors, Porphyry and Iamblichus, each developed, in their own way, certain isolated aspects of Plotinus' thought, but neither of them developed a rigorous philosophy to match that of their master. It was Proclus who, shortly before the closing of the Academy, bequeathed a systematic Platonic philosophy upon the world that in certain ways approached the sophistication of Plotinus. Finally, in the work of the so-called Pseudo-Dionysius, we find a grand synthesis of Platonic philosophy and Christian theology that was to exercise an immense influence on mediaeval mysticism and Renaissance Humanism.

Table of Contents

  1. What is Neoplatonism?
  2. Plotinian Neoplatonism
    1. Contemplation and Creation
    2. Nature and Personality
    3. Salvation and the Cosmic Process
      1. Plotinus' Last Words
    4. The Achievement of Plotinus
      1. The Plotinian Synthesis
  3. Porphyry and Iamblichus
    1. The Nature of the Soul
      1. The (re)turn to Astrology
    2. The Quest for Transcendence
      1. Theurgy and the Distrust of Dialectic
  4. Proclus and Pseudo-Dionysius
    1. Being -- Becoming -- Being
    2. The God Beyond Being
  5. Appendix: The Renaissance Platonists
  6. References and Further Reading

1. What is Neoplatonism?

The term 'Neoplatonism' is a modern construction. Plotinus, who is often considered the 'founder' of Neoplatonism, would not have considered himself a "new" Platonist in any sense, but simply an expositor of the doctrines of Plato. That this required him to formulate an entirely new philosophical system would not have been viewed by him as a problem, for it was, in his eyes, precisely what the Platonic doctrine required. In a sense, this is true, for as early as the Old Academy we find Plato's successors struggling with the proper interpretation of his thought, and arriving at strikingly different conclusions. Also, in the Hellenistic era, certain Platonic ideas were taken up by thinkers of various loyalties -- Jewish, Gnostic, Christian -- and worked up into new forms of expression that varied quite considerably from what Plato actually wrote in his Dialogues. Should this lead us to the conclusion that these thinkers were any less 'loyal' to Plato than were the members of the Academy (in its various forms throughout the centuries preceding Plotinus)? No; for the multiple and often contradictory uses made of Platonic ideas is a testament to the universality of Plato's thought -- that is, its ability to admit of a wide variety of interpretations and applications. In this sense, Neo-Platonism may be said to have begun immediately after Plato's death, when new approaches to his philosophy were being broached. Indeed, we already see a hint, in the doctrines of Xenocrates (the second head of the Old Academy) of a type of salvation theory involving the unification of the two parts of the human soul -- the "Olympian" or heavenly, and the "Titanic" or earthly (Dillon 1977, p. 27). If we accept Frederick Copleston's description of Neoplatonism as "the intellectualist reply to the ... yearning for personal salvation" (Copleston 1962, p. 216) we can already locate the beginning of this reply as far back as the Old Academy, and Neoplatonism would then not have begun with Plotinus. However, it is not clear that Xenocrates' idea of salvation involved the individual; it is quite possible that he was referring to a unified human nature in an abstract sense. In any case, the early Hermetic-Gnostic tradition is certainly to an extent Platonic, and later Gnosticism and Christian Logos theology markedly so. If an intellectual reply to a general yearning for personal salvation is what characterizes Neoplatonism, then the highly intellectual Gnostics and Christians of the Late Hellenistic era must be given the title of Neoplatonists. However, if we are to be rigorous and define Neoplatonism as the synthesis of various more or less 'Platonistic' ideas into a grand expression of Platonic philosophy, then Plotinus must be considered the founder of Neoplatonism. Yet we must not forget that these Platonizing Christian, Gnostic, Jewish, and other 'pagan' thinkers provided the necessary speculative material to make this synthesis possible.

2. Plotinian Neoplatonism

The great third century thinker and 'founder' of Neoplatonism, Plotinus, is responsible for the grand synthesis of progressive Christian and Gnostic ideas with the traditional Platonic philosophy. He answered the challenge of accounting for the emergence of a seemingly inferior and flawed cosmos from the perfect mind of the divinity by declaring outright that all objective existence is but the external self-expression of an inherently contemplative deity known as the One (to hen), or the Good (ta kalon). Plotinus compares the expression of the superior godhead with the self-expression of the individual soul, which proceeds from the perfect conception of a Form (eidos), to the always flawed expression of this Form in the manner of a materially derived 'personality' that risks succumbing to the demands of divisive discursivity, and so becomes something less than divine. This diminution of the divine essence in temporality is but a necessary moment of the complete expression of the One. By elevating the experience of the individual soul to the status of an actualization of a divine Form, Plotinus succeeded, also, in preserving, if not the autonomy, at least the dignity and ontological necessity of personality. The Cosmos, according to Plotinus, is not a created order, planned by a deity on whom we can pass the charge of begetting evil; for the Cosmos is the self-expression of the Soul, which corresponds, roughly, to Philo's logos prophorikos, the logos endiathetos of which is the Intelligence (nous). Rather, the Cosmos, in Plotinian terms, is to be understood as the concrete result or 'product' of the Soul's experience of its own Mind (nous). Ideally, this concrete expression should serve the Soul as a reference-point for its own self-conscious existence; however, the Soul all too easily falls into the error of valuing the expression over the principle (arkhê), which is the contemplation of the divine Forms. This error gives rise to evil, which is the purely subjective relation of the Soul (now divided) to the manifold and concrete forms of its expressive act. When the Soul, in the form of individual existents, becomes thus preoccupied with its experience, Nature comes into being, and the Cosmos takes on concrete form as the locus of personality.

a. Contemplation and Creation

Hearkening back, whether consciously or not, to the doctrine of Speusippus (Plato's successor in the Academy) that the One is utterly transcendent and "beyond being," and that the Dyad is the true first principle (Dillon 1977, p. 12), Plotinus declares that the One is "alone with itself" and ineffable (cf. Enneads VI.9.6 and V.2.1). The One does not act to produce a cosmos or a spiritual order, but simply generates from itself, effortlessly, a power (dunamis) which is at once the Intellect (nous) and the object of contemplation (theôria) of this Intellect. While Plotinus suggests that the One subsists by thinking itself as itself, the Intellect subsists through thinking itself as other, and therefore becomes divided within itself: this act of division within the Intellect is the production of Being, which is the very principle of expression or discursivity (Ennead V.1.7). For this reason, the Intellect stands as Plotinus' sole First Principle. At this point, the thinking or contemplation of the Intellect is divided up and ordered into thoughts, each of them subsisting in and for themselves, as autonomous reflections of the dunamis of the One. These are the Forms (eidê), and out of their inert unity there arises the Soul, whose task it is to think these Forms discursively and creatively, and to thereby produce or create a concrete, living expression of the divine Intellect. This activity of the Soul results in the production of numerous individual souls: living actualizations of the possibilities inherent in the Forms. Whereas the Intellect became divided within itself through contemplation, the Soul becomes divided outside of itself, through action (which is still contemplation, according to Plotinus, albeit the lowest type; cf. Ennead III.8.4), and this division constitutes the Cosmos, which is the expressive or creative act of the Soul, also referred to as Nature. When the individual soul reflects upon Nature as its own act, this soul is capable of attaining insight (gnôsis) into the essence of Intellect; however, when the soul views nature as something objective and external -- that is, as something to be experienced or undergone, while forgetting that the soul itself is the creator of this Nature -- evil and suffering ensue. Let us now examine the manner in which Plotinus explains Nature as the locus of personality.

b. Nature and Personality

Contemplation, at the level of the Soul, is for Plotinus a two-way street. The Soul both contemplates, passively, the Intellect, and reflects upon its own contemplative act by producing Nature and the Cosmos. The individual souls that become immersed in Nature, as moments of the Soul's eternal act, will, ideally, gain a complete knowledge of the Soul in its unity, and even of the Intellect, by reflecting upon the concrete results of the Soul's act -- that is, upon the externalized, sensible entities that comprise the physical Cosmos. This reflection, if carried by the individual soul with a memory of its provenance always in the foreground, will lead to a just governing of the physical Cosmos, which will make of it a perfect material image of the Intellectual Cosmos, i.e., the realm of the Forms (cf. Enneads IV.3.7 and IV.8.6). However, things don't always turn out so well, for individual souls often "go lower than is needful ... in order to light the lower regions, but it is not good for them to go so far" (Ennead IV.3.17, tr. O'Brien 1964). For when the soul extends itself ever farther into the indeterminacy of materiality, it gradually loses memory of its divine origin, and comes to identify itself more and more with its surroundings -- that is to say: the soul identifies itself with the results of the Soul's act, and forgets that it is, as part of this Soul, itself an agent of the act. This is tantamount to a relinquishing, by the soul, of its divine nature. When the soul has thus abandoned itself, it begins to accrue many alien encrustations, if you will, that make of it something less than divine. These encrustations are the 'accidents' (in the Aristotelian sense) of personality. And yet the soul is never completely lost, for, as Plotinus insists, the soul need simply "think upon essential being" in order to return to itself, and continue to exist authentically as a governor of the Cosmos (Ennead IV.8.4-6). The memory of the personality that this wandering soul possessed must be forgotten in order for it to return completely to its divine nature; for if it were remembered, we would have to say, contradictorily, that the soul holds a memory of what occurred during its state of forgetfulness! So in a sense, Plotinus holds that individual personalities are not maintained at the level of Soul. However, if we understand personality as more than just a particular attitude attached to a concrete mode of existence, and rather view it as the sum total of experiences reflected upon in intellect, then souls most certainly retain their personalities, even at the highest level, for they persist as thoughts within the divine Mind (cp. Ennead IV.8.5). The personality that one acquires in action (the lowest type of contemplation) is indeed forgotten and dissolved, but the 'personality' or persistence in intellect that one achieves through virtuous acts most definitely endures (Ennead IV.3.32).

c. Salvation and the Cosmic Process

Plotinus, like his older contemporary, the Christian philosopher Origen of Alexandria, views the descent of the soul into the material realm as a necessary moment in the unfolding of the divine Intellect, or God. For this reason, the descent itself is not an evil, for it is a reflection of God's essence. Both Origen and Plotinus place the blame for experiencing this descent as an evil squarely upon the individual soul. Of course, these thinkers held, respectively, quite different views as to why and how the soul experiences the descent as an evil; but they held one thing in common: that the rational soul will naturally choose the Good, and that any failure to do so is the result of forgetfulness or acquired ignorance. But whence this failure? Origen gave what, to Plotinus' mind, must have been a quite unsatisfactory answer: that souls pre-existed as spiritual beings, and when they desired to create or 'beget' independently of God, they all fell into error, and languished there until the coming of Logos Incarnate. This view has more than a little Gnostic flavor to it, which would have sat ill with Plotinus, who was a great opponent of Gnosticism. The fall of the soul Plotinus refers, quite simply, to the tension between pure contemplation and divisive action -- a tension that constitutes the natural mode of existence of the soul (cf. Ennead IV.8.6-7). Plotinus tells us that a thought is only completed or fully comprehended after it has been expressed, for only then can the thought be said to have passed from potentiality to actuality (Ennead IV.3.30). The question of whether Plotinus places more value on the potential or the actual is really of no consequence, for in the Plotinian plêrôma every potentiality generates an activity, and every activity becomes itself a potential for new activity (cf. Ennead III.8.8); and since the One, which is the goal or object of desire of all existents, is neither potentiality nor actuality, but "beyond being" (epekeina ousias), it is impossible to say whether the striving of existents, in Plotinus' schema, will result in full and complete actualization, or in a repose of potentiality that will make them like their source. "Likeness to God as far as possible," for Plotinus, is really likeness to oneself -- authentic existence. Plotinus leaves it up to the individual to determine what this means.

i. Plotinus' Last Words

In his biography of Plotinus, Porphyry records the last words of his teacher to his students as follows: "Strive to bring back the god in yourselves to the God in the All" (Porphyry, Life of Plotinus 2, my translation). After uttering these words, Plotinus, one of the greatest philosophers the world has ever known, passed away. The simplicity of this final statement seems to be at odds with the intellectual rigors of Plotinus' treatises, which challenge -- and more often than not vanquish -- just about every prominent philosophical view of the era. But this is only if we take this remark in a mystical or ecstatic religious sense. Plotinus demanded the utmost level of intellectual clarity in dealing with the problem of humankind's relation to the highest principle of existence. Striving for or desiring salvation was not, for Plotinus, an excuse for simply abandoning oneself to faith or prayer or unreflective religious rituals; rather, salvation was to be achieved through the practice of philosophical investigation, of dialectic. The fact that Plotinus, at the end of his life, had arrived at this very simple formulation, serves to show that his dialectical quest was successful. In his last treatise, "On the Primal Good" (Ennead I.7), Plotinus is able to assert, in the same breath, that both life and death are good. He says this because life is the moment in which the soul expresses itself and revels in the autonomy of the creative act. However, this life, since it is characterized by action, eventually leads to exhaustion, and the desire, not for autonomous action, but for reposeful contemplation -- of a fulfillment that is purely intellectual and eternal. Death is the relief of this exhaustion, and the return to a state of contemplative repose. Is this return to the Intellect a return to potentiality? It is hard to say. Perhaps it is a synthesis of potentiality and actuality: the moment at which the soul is both one and many, both human and divine. This would constitute Plotinian salvation -- the fulfillment of the exhortation of the dying sage.

d. The Achievement of Plotinus

In the last analysis, what stands as the most important and impressive accomplishment of Plotinus is the manner in which he synthesized the pure, 'semi-mythical' expression of Plato with the logical rigors of the Peripatetic and Stoic schools, yet without losing sight of philosophy's most important task: of rendering the human experience in intelligible and analyzable terms. That Plotinus' thought had to take the 'detour' through such wildly mystical and speculative paths as Gnosticism and Christian salvation theology is only proof of his clear-sightedness, thoroughness, and admirable humanism. For all of his dialectical difficulties and perambulations, Plotinus' sole concern is with the well-being (eudaimonia) of the human soul. This is, of course, to be understood as an intellectual, as opposed to a merely physical or even emotional well-being, for Plotinus was not concerned with the temporary or the temporal. The striving of the human mind for a mode of existence more suited to its intuited potential than the ephemeral possibilities of this material realm, while admittedly a striving born of temporality, is nonetheless directed toward atemporal and divine perfection. This is a striving or desire rendered all the more poignant and worthy of philosophy precisely because it is born in the depths of existential angst, and not in the primitive ecstasies of unreflective ritual. As the last true representative of the Greek philosophical spirit, Plotinus is Apollonian, not Dionysian. His concern is with the intellectual beautification of the human soul, and for this reason his notion of salvation does not, like Origen's, imply an eternal state of objective contemplation of the divinity -- for Plotinus, the separation between human and god breaks down, so that when the perfected soul contemplates itself, it is also contemplating the Supreme.

i. The Plotinian Synthesis

Plotinus was faced with the task of defending the true Platonic philosophy, as he understood it, against the inroads being made, in his time, most of all by Gnostics, but also by orthodox Christianity. Instead of launching an all-out attack on these new ideas, Plotinus took what was best from them, in his eyes, and brought these ideas into concert with his own brand of Platonism. For this reason, we are sometimes surprised to see Plotinus, in one treatise, speaking of the cosmos as a realm of forgetfulness and error, while in another, speaking of the cosmos as the most perfect expression of the godhead. Once we realize the extent to which certain Gnostic sects went in order to brand this world as a product of an evil and malignant Demiurge, to whom we owe absolutely no allegiance, it becomes clear that Plotinus was simply trying to temper the extreme form of an idea which he himself shared, though in a less radical sense. The feeling of being thrown into a hostile and alien world is a philosophically valid position from which to begin a critique and investigation of human existence; indeed, modern existentialist philosophers have often started from this same premise. However, Plotinus realized that it is not the nature of the human soul to simply escape from a realm of active engagement with external reality (the cosmos) to a passive receptance of divine form (within the plêrôma). The Soul, as Plotinus understands it, is an essentially creative being, and one which understands existence on its own terms. One of the beauties of Plotinus' system is that everything he says concerning the nature of the Cosmos (spiritual and physical) can equally be held of the Soul. Now while it would be false to charge Plotinus with solipsism (or even narcissism, as one prominent commentator has done; cf. Julia Kristeva in Hadot 1993, p. 11), it would be correct to say that the entire Cosmos is an analogue of the experience of the Soul, which results in the attainment of full self-consciousness. The form of Plotinus' system is the very form by which the Soul naturally comes to know itself in relation to its acts; and the expression of the Soul will always, therefore, be a philosophical expression. When we speak of the Plotinian synthesis, then, what we are speaking of is a natural dialectic of the Soul, which takes its own expressions into account, no matter how faulty or incomplete they may appear in retrospect, and weaves them into a cosmic tapestry of noetic images.

3. Porphyry and Iamblichus

Porphyry of Tyre (ca. 233-305 CE) is the most famous pupil of Plotinus. In addition to writing an introductory summary of his master's theories (the treatise entitled Launching-Points to the Realm of Mind), Porphyry also composed the famous Isagoge, an introduction to the Categories of Aristotle, which came to exercise an immense influence on Mediaeval Scholasticism. The extent of Porphyry's investigative interests exceeded that of his teacher, and his so-called "scientific" works, which survive to this day, include a treatise on music (On Prosody), and two studies of the astronomical and astrological theories of Claudius Ptolemy (ca. 70-140 CE), On the Harmonics, and an Introduction to The Astronomy of Ptolemy. He wrote biographies of Pythagoras and Plotinus, and edited and compiled the latter's essays into six books, each containing nine treatises, giving them the title Enneads. Unlike Plotinus, Porphyry was interested primarily in the practical aspect of salvific striving, and the manner in which the soul could most effectively bring about its transference to ever higher realms of existence. This led Porphyry to develop a doctrine of ascent to the Intellect by way of the exercise of virtue (aretê) in the form of 'good works'. This doctrine may owe its genesis to Porphyry's supposed early adherence to Christianity, as attested by the historian Socrates, and suggested by St. Augustine (cf. Copleston 1962, p. 218). If Porphyry had, at some point, been a Christian, this would account for his belief in the soul's objective relation to the divine Mind -- an idea shared by Origen, whom Porphyry knew as a youth (cf. Eusebius, The History of the Church, p. 195) -- and would explain his quite un-Plotinian belief in a gradual progress toward perfection, as opposed to the 'instant salvation' proposed by Plotinus (cf. Ennead IV.8.4).

Iamblichus of Apamea (d. ca. 330 CE) was a student of Porphyry. He departed from his teacher on more than a few points, most notably in his insistence on demoting Plotinus' One (which Porphyry left unscathed, as it were) to the level of kosmos noêtos, which according to Iamblichus generates the intellectual realm (kosmos noêros). In this regard, Iamblichus can be said to have either severely misunderstood, or neglected to even attempt to understand, Plotinus on the important doctrine of contemplation (see above). This view led Iamblichus to posit a Supreme One even higher than the One of Plotinus, which generates the Intellectual Cosmos, and yet remains beyond all predication and determinacy. Iamblichus also made a tripartite division of Soul, positing a cosmic or All-Soul, and two lesser souls, corresponding to the rational and irrational faculties, respectively. This somewhat gratuitous skewing of the Plotinian noetic realm also led Iamblichus to posit an array of intermediate spiritual beings between the lower souls and the intelligible realm -- daemons, the souls of heroes, and angels of all sorts. By placing so much distance between the earthly soul and the intelligible realm, Iamblichus made it difficult for the would-be philosopher to gain an intuitive knowledge of the higher Soul, although he insisted that everyone possesses such knowledge, coupled with an innate desire for the Good. In place of the vivid dialectic of Plotinus, Iamblichus established the practice of theurgy (theourgia), which he insists does not draw the gods down to man, but rather renders humankind, "who through generation are born subject to passion, pure and unchangeable" (On the Mysteries I.12.42; in Fowden 1986, p. 133). Whereas "likeness to God" had meant, for Plotinus, a recollection and perfection of one's own divine nature (which is, in the last analysis, identical to nous; cf. Ennead III.4), for Iamblichus the relation of humankind to the divine is one of subordinate to superior, and so the pagan religious piety that Plotinus had scorned -- "Let the gods come to me, and not I to them," he had once said (cf. Porphyry, Life of Plotinus 10) -- returns to philosophy with a vengeance. Iamblichus is best known for his lengthy treatise On the Mysteries. Like Porphyry, he also wrote a biography of Pythagoras.

a. The Nature of the Soul

In his introduction to the philosophy of Plotinus, entitled Launching-Points to the Realm of Mind, Porphyry remarks that the inclination of the incorporeal Soul toward corporeality "constitutes a second nature [the irrational soul], which unites with the body" (Launching-Points 18 [1]). This remark is supposedly a commentary on Ennead IV.2, where Plotinus discusses the relation of the individual soul to the All-Soul. While it is true that Plotinus often speaks of the individual soul as being independent of the highest Soul, he does this for illustrative purposes, in order to show how far into forgetfulness the soul that has become enamored of its act may fall. Yet Plotinus insists time and again that the individual soul and the All-Soul are one (cf. esp. Ennead IV.1), and that Nature is the Soul's expressive act (see above). Irrationality does not constitute, for Plotinus, a "second nature," but is merely a flawed exercise of rationality -- that is, doxa untempered by epistêmê -- on the part of the individual soul. Furthermore, the individual soul, which comes to unite with corporeality, governs and controls the body, making possible discursive knowledge as well as sense-perception. Uncontrolled pathos is what Plotinus calls irrationality; the soul brings aisthêsis (perceptive judgment) to corporeality, and so prevents it from sinking into irrational passivity. So what led Porphyry to make such an interpretative error, if error it was? It is quite possible that Porphyry had arrived at his own conclusions about the Soul, and tried to square his own theory with what Plotinus actually taught. One clue to the reason for the 'misunderstanding' may possibly lie in Porphyry's early involvement with Christianity. While Porphyry himself never tells us that he had been a Christian, Augustine speaks of him as if he were an apostate, and the historian Socrates states outright that Porphyry had once been of the Christian faith, telling us that he left the fold in disgust after being assaulted by a rowdy band of Christians in Caesarea (Copleston 1962, p. 218). In any case, it is certain that he was acquainted with Plotinus' older contemporary, the Christian Origen, and that he had been exposed to Christian doctrine. Indeed, his own spirited attack on Christianity ("Fifteen Arguments Against the Christians," now preserved only in fragments) shows him to have possessed a wide knowledge of Holy Scripture, remarkable for a 'pagan' philosopher of that era. Porphyry's exposure to Christian doctrine, then, would have left him with a view of salvation quite different from that of Plotinus, who seems never to have paid Christianity much mind. The best evidence we have for this explanation is Porphyry's own theory of salvation -- and it is remarkably similar to what we find in Origen! Porphyry's salvation theory is dependent, like Origen's, on a notion of the soul's objective relation to God, and its consequent striving, not to actualize its own divine potentiality, but to attain a level of virtue that makes it capable of partaking fully of the divine essence. This is accomplished through the exercise of virtue, which sets the soul on a gradual course of progress toward the highest Good. Beginning with simple 'practical virtues' (politikai arêtai) the soul gradually rises to higher levels, eventually attaining what Porphyry calls the paradeigmatikai arêtai or 'exemplary virtues' which make of the soul a living expression of the divine Mind (cf. Porphyry, Letter to Marcella 29). Note that Porphyry stops the soul's ascent at nous, and presumably holds that the 'saved' soul will eternally contemplate the infinite power of the One. If Porphyry's concern had been with the preservation of personality, then this explanation makes some sense. However, it is more likely that the true reason for Porphyry's rejection of the radically 'hubristic' theory (at least to pietistic pagans) of the nature of the individual soul held by Plotinus was a result of his intention to restore dignity to the traditional religion of the Greeks (which had come under attack not only by Plotinus, but by Christians as well). Evidence of such a program resides in Porphyry's allegorical interpretations of Homer and traditional cultic practice, as well as his possibly apologetic work on Philosophy from Oracles (now lost). Compared to Plotinus, then, Porphyry was quite the conservative, concerned as he was with maintaining the ancient view of humankind's relatively humble position in the cosmic hierarchy, over against Plotinus' view that the soul is a god, owing little more than a passing nod to its 'noble brethren' in the heavens.

i. The (re)turn to Astrology

One of the results of Porphyry's conservative position toward traditional religious practice and belief was the 'return' to the doctrine that the stars and planets are capable of affecting and ordering human life. Plotinus argued that since the individual soul is one with the All-Soul, it is in essence a co-creator of the Cosmos, and therefore not really subject to the laws governing the Cosmos -- for the soul is the source and agent of those laws! Therefore, a belief in astrology was, for Plotinus, absurd, since if the soul turned to beings dependent upon its own law -- i.e., the stars and planets -- in order to know itself, then it would only end up knowing aspects of its own act, and would never return to itself in full self-consciousness. Furthermore, as we have seen, Plotinian salvation was instantly available to the soul, if only it would turn its mind to "essential being" (see above); because of this, Plotinus saw no reason to bring the stars and planets into the picture. For Porphyry, however, who believed that the soul must gradually work toward salvation, a knowledge of the operations of the heavenly bodies and their relation to humankind would have been an important tool in gaining ever higher levels of virtue. In fact, Porphyry seems to have held the view that the soul receives certain "powers" from each of the planets -- right judgment from Saturn, proper exercise of the will from Jupiter, impulse from Mars, opinion and imagination from the Sun, and (what else?) sensuous desire from Venus; from the Moon the soul receives the power of physical production (cf. Hegel, p. 430) -- and that these powers enable to the soul to know things both earthly and heavenly. This theoretical knowledge of the powers of the planets, then, would have made the more practical knowledge of astrology quite useful and meaningful for an individual soul seeking to know itself as such. The usefulness of astrology for Porphyry, in this regard, probably resided in its ability to permit an individual, through an analysis of his birth chart, to know which planet -- and therefore which "power" -- exercised the dominant influence on his life. In keeping with the ancient Greek doctrine of the "golden mean," the task of the individual would then be to work to bring to the fore those other "powers" -- each present to a lesser degree in the soul, but still active -- and thereby achieve a balance or sôphrosunê that would render the soul more capable of sharing in the divine Mind. The art of astrology, it must be remembered, was in wide practice in the Hellenistic world, and Plotinus' rejection of it was an exception that was by no means the rule. Plotinus' views on astrology apparently found few adherents, even among Platonists, for we see not only Porphyry, but also (to an extent) Iamblichus and even Proclus declaring its value -- the latter being responsible for a paraphrase of Claudius Ptolemy's astrological compendium known as the Tetrabiblos or sometimes simply as The Astronomy. In addition to penning a commentary on Ptolemy's tome, Porphyry also wrote his own Introduction to Astronomy (by which is apparently meant "Astrology," the modern distinction not holding in Hellenistic times). Unfortunately, this work no longer survives intact.

(For more on this topic, see Hellenistic Astrology.)

b. The Quest for Transcendence

The philosophy of Plotinus was highly discursive, meaning that it operated on the assumption that the highest meaning, the most profound truth (even a so-called mystical truth) is translatable, necessarily, into language; and furthermore, that any and every experience only attains its full value as meaning when it has reached expression in the form of language. This idea, of course, placed the One always beyond the discursive understanding of the human soul, since the One was proclaimed, by Plotinus, to be not only beyond discursive knowledge, but also the very source and possibility of such knowledge. According to Plotinus, then, any time the individual soul expresses a certain truth in language, this very act is representative of the power of the One. This notion of the simultaneous intimate proximity of the One to the soul, and, paradoxically, its extreme transcendence and ineffability, is possible only within the confines of a purely subjective and introspective philosophy like that of Plotinus; and since such a philosophy, by its very nature, cannot appeal to common, external perceptions, it is destined to remain the sole provenance of the sensitive and enlightened few. Porphyry did not want to admit this, and so he found himself seeking, as St. Augustine tells us, "a universal way (universalem viam) for the liberation of the soul" (City of God 10.32, in Fowden, p. 132), believing, as he did, that no such way had yet been discovered by or within philosophy. This did not imply, for Porphyry, a wholesale rejection of the Plotinian dialectic in favor of a more esoteric process of salvation; but it did lead Porphyry (see above) to look to astrology as a means of orienting the soul toward its place in the cosmos, and thereby allowing it to achieve the desired salvation in the most efficacious manner possible. Iamblichus, on the other hand, rejected even Porphyry's approach, in favor of a path toward the divinity that is more worthy of priests (hieratikoi) than philosophers; for Iamblichus believed that not only the One, but all the gods and demi-gods, exceed and transcend the individual soul, making it necessary for the soul seeking salvation to call upon the superior beings to aid it in its progress. This is accomplished, Iamblichus tells us, by "the perfective operation of unspeakable acts (erga) correctly performed ... acts which are beyond all understanding (huper pasan noêsin)" and which are "intelligible only to the gods" (On the Mysteries II.11.96-7, in Fowden, p. 132). These ritualistic acts, and the 'logic' underlying them, Iamblichus terms "theurgy" (theourgia). These theurgic acts are necessary, for Iamblichus, because he is convinced that philosophy, which is based solely upon thought (ennoia) -- and thought, we must remember, is always an accomplishment of the individual mind, and hence discursive -- is unable to reach that which is beyond thought. The practice of theurgy, then, becomes a way for the soul to experience the presence of the divinity, instead of merely thinking or conceptualizing the godhead. Porphyry took issue with this view, in his Letter to Anebo, which is really a criticism of the ideas of his pupil, Iamblichus, where he stated that, since theurgy is a physical process, it cannot possibly translate into a spiritual effect. Iamblichus' On the Mysteries was written as a reply to Porphyry's criticisms, but the defense of the pupil did not succeed in vanquishing the persistent attacks of the master. While both Porphyry and Iamblichus recognized, to a lesser and greater extent, respectively, the limitations of the Plotinian dialectic, Porphyry held firm to the idea that since the divinity is immaterial it can only be grasped in a noetic fashion -- i.e., discursively (and even astrology, in spite of its mediative capacity, is still an intellectual exercise, open to dialectic and narratization); Iamblichus, adhering roughly to the same view, nevertheless argued that the human soul must not think god on its own terms, but must allow itself to be transformed by the penetrating essence of god, of which the soul partakes through rituals intended to transform the particularized, fragmented soul into a being that is "pure and unchangeable" (cf. On the Mysteries I.12.42; Fowden, p. 133).

i. Theurgy and the Distrust of Dialectic

According to the schema of Plotinian dialectic, the 'stance' of the individual soul is the sole source of truth certainty, being a judging faculty dependent always upon the higher Soul. From the perspective of one who believes that the soul is immersed in Nature, instead of recognizing, as Plotinus did, the soul's status as an intimate governor of Nature (which is the Soul's own act), dialectic may very well appear as a solipsistic (and therefore faulty) attempt on the part of an individual mind to know its reality by imposing conceptual structures and strictures upon the phenomena that constitute this reality. Iamblichus believed that since every individual soul is immersed in the 'bodily element,' no soul is capable of understanding the divine nature through the pure exercise of human reason -- for reason itself, at the level of the human soul-body composite, is tainted by the changeable nature of matter, and therefore incapable of rising to that perfect knowledge that is beyond all change (cp. Plato, Phaedrus 247e). Dialectic, then, as the soul's attempt to know reality, is seen by Iamblichus as an attempt by an already fallen being to lead itself up out of the very locus of its own forgetfulness. Now Iamblichus does not completely reject dialectical reason; he simply requests that it be tempered by an appeal to intermediate divinities, who will aid the fallen soul in its ascent back towards the Supreme Good. The practice of ritualistic theurgy is the medium by which the fallen soul ascends to a point at which it becomes capable of engaging in a meaningful dialectic with the divinity. This dependence upon higher powers nevertheless negates the soul's own innate ability to think itself as god, and so we may say that Iamblichus' ideas represent a decisive break with the philosophy of Plotinus.

4. Proclus and Pseudo-Dionysius

Proclus (410-485 CE) is, next to Plotinus, the most accomplished and rigorous of the Neoplatonists. Born in Constantinople, he studied philosophy in Athens, and through diligent effort rose to the rank of head teacher or 'scholarch' of that great school. In addition to his accomplishments in philosophy, Proclus was also a religious universalist, who had himself initiated into all the mystery religions being practiced during his time. This was doubtless due to the influence of Iamblichus, whom Proclus held in high esteem (cf. Proclus, Theology of Plato III; in Hegel, p. 432). The philosophical expression of Proclus is more precise and logically ordered than that of Plotinus. Indeed, Proclus posits the Intellect (nous) as the culmination of the productive act (paragein) of the One; this is in opposition to Plotinus, who described the Intellect as proceeding directly from the One, thereby placing Mind before Thought, and so making thought the process by which the Intellect becomes alienated from itself, thus requiring the salvific act in order to attain the fulfillment of Being, which is, for Plotinus, the return of Intellect to itself. Proclus understands the movement of existence as a tripartite progression beginning with an abstract unity, passing into a multiplicity that is identified with Life, and returning again to a unity that is no longer merely abstract, but now actualized as an eternal manifestation of the godhead. What constituted, for Plotinus, the salvific drama of human existence is, for Proclus, simply the logical, natural order of things. However, by thus removing the yearning for salvation from human existence, as something to be accomplished, positively, Proclus is ignoring or overly intellectualizing, if you will, an existential aspect of human existence that is as real as it is powerful. Plotinus recognized the importance of the salvific drive for the realization of true philosophy, making philosophy a means to an end; Proclus utilizes philosophy, rather, more in the manner of a useful, descriptive language by which a thinker may describe the essential realities of a merely contingent existence. In this sense, Proclus is more faithful to the 'letter' of Plato's Dialogues; but for this same reason he fails to rise to the 'spirit' of the Platonic philosophy. Proclus' major works include commentaries on Plato's Timaeus, Republic, Parmenides, Alcibiades I, and the Cratylus. He also wrote treatises on the Theology of Plato, On Providence, and On the Subsistence of Evil. His most important work is undoubtedly the Elements of Theology, which contains the clearest exposition of his ideas.

a. Being -- Becoming -- Being

We found, in Plotinus, an explanation and expression of a cosmos that involved a gradual development from all but static unity toward eventual alienation -- a moment at which the active soul must make the profound decision to renounce autonomous existence and re-merge with the source of all Being, or else remain forever in the darkness of forgetfulness and error. Salvation, for Plotinus, was relatively easy to accomplish, but never guaranteed. For Proclus, on the other hand, the arkhê or 'ruling beginning' of all Life is the 'One-in-itself' (to auto hen), or that which is responsible for the ordering of all existents, insofar as existence is, in the last analysis, the sovereign act or expression of this primordial unity or monad. The expression of this One is perfectly balanced, being a trinity containing, as distinct expressions, each moment of self-realization of this One; and each of these moments, according to Proclus, have the structure of yet another trinity. The first trinity corresponds to the limit, which is the guide and reference-point of all further manifestations; the second to the unlimited, which is also Life or the productive power (dunamis); and the third, finally, to the 'mixture' (mikton, diakosmos), which is the self-reflective moment of return during which the soul realizes itself as a thinking -- i.e., living -- entity. Thought is, therefore, the culmination of Life and the fulfillment of Being. Thought is also the reason (logos) that binds these triadic unities together in a grand harmonious plêrôma, if you will. Being, for Proclus, is that divine self-presence, "shut up without development and maintained in strict isolation" (Hegel, p. 446) which is the object of Life's thinking; this 'object' gives rise to that thinking which leads, eventually, to understanding (nous), which is the thought of being, and appears (ekphanôs), always, as 'being's begetter'. When the circle is completed, and reflected upon, logically, we are met with the following onto-cosmological schema: thought (noêtos, also known as 'Being') giving rise to its "negative" which is thinking (Hegel, p. 393) and the thought 'it is' (noêtos kai noêros), produces its own precise reflection -- 'pure thinking' -- and this reflection is the very manifestation (phanerôsis) of the deity within the fluctuating arena of individual souls. Being is eternal and static precisely because it always returns to itself as Being; and 'Becoming'is the conceptual term for this process, which involves the cyclical play between that which is and is not, at any given time. "[T]he thought of every man is identical with the existence of every man, and each is both the thought and the existence" (Proclus, Platonic Theology III., in Hegel, p. 449). The autonomous drive toward dissolution, which is so germane to the soul as such, is wiped away by Proclus, for his dialectic is impeccably clean. However, he does not account for the yearning for the infinite (as does Plotinus) and the consequent existential desire for productive power falls on its face before the supreme god of autonomous creation -- which draws all existents into its primeval web of dissolution.

b. The God Beyond Being

Very little is known about the life of the so-called Pseudo-Dionysius. For many centuries, the writings of this mystical philosopher were believed to have been from the pen of none other Dionysius, the disciple of St. Paul. Later scholarship has shed considerable doubt on this claim, and most modern scholars believe this author to have been active during the late fifth century CE. Indeed, the earliest reference to the Dionysian Corpus that we possess is from 533 CE. There is no mention of this author's work before this date. Careful study of the Pseudo-Dionysian writings has uncovered many parallels between the theurgical doctrines of Iamblichus, and the triadic metaphysical schema of Proclus. Yet what we witness in these writings is the attempt by a thinker who is at once religiously sensitive and philosophically engaged to bring the highly developed Platonism of his time into line with a Christian theological tradition that was apparently persisting on the fringes of orthodoxy. To this extent, we may refer to the Pseudo-Dionysius as a 'decadent,' for he (or she?) was writing at a time when the heyday of Platonism had attained the status of a palaios logos ('ancient teaching') to be, not merely commented upon, but savored as an aesthetic monument to an era already long past. It is important to note, in this regard, that the writings of Pseudo-Dionysius do not contain any theoretical arguments or dialectical moments, but simply many subtle variations on the apophatic/kataphatic theology for which our writer is renowned. Indeed, he writes as if his readers already know, and are merely in need of clarification. His message is quite simple, and is manifestly distilled from the often cumbersome doctrines of earlier thinkers (especially Iamblichus and Proclus). Pseudo-Dionysius professes a God who is beyond all distinctions, and who even transcends the means utilized by human beings to reach Him. For Pseudo-Dionysius, the Holy Trinity (which is probably analogous to Proclus' highest trinity, see above) serves as a "guide" to the human being who seeks not only to know but to unite with "him who is beyond all being and knowledge" (Pseudo-Dionysius, The Mystical Theology 997A-1000A, tr. C. Luibheid 1987). In the expression of the Pseudo-Dionysius the yearning for the infinite reaches a poetical form that at once fulfills and exceeds philosophy.

5. Appendix:`The Renaissance Platonists

After the closing of the Neoplatonic Academy in Athens by the Emperor Justinian in 529 CE, Platonism ceased to be a living philosophy. Due to the efforts of the Christian philosopher Boethius (480-525 CE), who translated Porphyry's Isagoge, and composed numerous original works as well, the Middle Ages received a faint glimmer of the ancient glories of the Platonic philosophy. St. Augustine, also, was responsible for imparting a sense of Neoplatonic doctrine to the Latin West, but this was by way of commentary and critique, and not in any way a systematic exposition of the philosophy. Generally speaking, it is safe to say that the European Middle Ages remained in the grip of Aristotelianism until the early Renaissance, when certain brilliant Italian thinkers began to rediscover, translate, and expound upon the original texts of Platonism. Chief among these thinkers were Marsilio Ficino (1433-1492) and Pico della Mirandola (1463-1494). Ficino produced fine Latin translations of Plato's Dialogues, the Enneads of Plotinus, and numerous works by Porphyry, Iamblichus, Proclus, Pseudo-Dionysius, and many others. In addition to his scholarly ability, Ficino was also a fine commentator and philosopher in his own right. His brilliant essay on Five Questions Concerning The Mind is a concise summary of general Neoplatonic doctrine, based upon Ficino's own view that the lot of the human soul is to inquire into its own nature, and that since this inquiry causes the human soul to experience misery, the soul must do everything it can to transcend the physical body and live a life worthy of the blessed angels (cf. Cassirer, et. al. (ed) 1948, p. 211-212). Giovanni Pico, the Count of Mirandola, was a colorful figure who lived a short life, fraught with strife. He roused the ire of the papacy by composing a voluminous work defending nine-hundred theses drawn from his vast reading of the Ancients; thirteen of these theses were deemed heretical by the papacy, and yet Pico refused to change or withdraw a single one. Like his friend Ficino, Pico was a devotee of ancient wisdom, drawing not only upon the Platonic canon, but also upon the Pre-Socratic literature and the Hermetic Corpus, especially the Poimandres. Pico's most famous work is the Oration on the Dignity of Man, in which he eloquently states his learned view that humankind was created by God "as a creature of indeterminate nature," possessed of the unique ability to ascend or descend on the scale of Being through the autonomous exercise of free will (Oration 3, in Cassirer, et. al. (ed) 1948, p. 224). Pico's view of free will was quite different from that expressed by Plotinus, and indeed most other Neoplatonists, and it came as no surprise when Pico composed a treatise On Being and the One which ended on Aristotelian terms, declaring the One to be coincident with or persisting amidst Being -- a wholly un-Platonic doctrine. With Ficino, then, we may say that Platonism achieved a brief moment of archaic glory, while with Pico, it was plunged once again into the quagmire of self-referential empiricism.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Cassirer, Ernst; Kristeller, Paul Oskar; Randall, John Herman Jr. (editors) The Renaissance Philosophy of Man (University of Chicago Press 1948).
  • Cooper, John M. (ed.), Plato: Complete Works (Hackett Publishing 1997).
  • Copleston S.J., Frederick, A History of Philosophy (vol. I, part II): Greece and Rome (Image Books 1962).
  • Dillon, John (1977), The Middle Platonists (Cornell University Press).
  • Eusebius (tr. G.A. Williamson 1965), The History of the Church (Penguin Books).
  • Fowden, Garth, The Egyptian Hermes: A Historical Approach To The Late Pagan Mind (Cambridge University Press 1986).
  • Hadot, Pierre (tr. M. Chase), Plotinus, or The Simplicity of Vision (University of Chicago Press 1993).
  • Hegel, Georg Wilhelm Friedrich (tr. E.S. Haldane and Frances H. Simson), Lectures on the History of Philosophy (vol. II): Plato And The Platonists (Bison Books 1995).
  • Jaeger, Werner, Early Christianity and Greek Paideia (Harvard University Press 1961).
  • Layton, Bentley (1987), The Gnostic Scriptures (Doubleday: The Anchor Bible Reference Library).
  • O'Brien S.J., Elmer (1964), The Essential Plotinus: Representative Treatises From The Enneads (Hackett Publishing).
  • Origen of Alexandria, Commentary on John, tr. in The Ante-Nicene Fathers, vol. X. (Eerdmans 1979, reprint).
  • Origen of Alexandria, On First Principles [De Principiis], tr. in The Ante-Nicene Fathers, vol. IV. (Eerdmans 1979, reprint).
  • Philo of Alexandria (tr. F.H. Colson and G.H. Whitaker), On the Creation of the World [De Opificio Mundi], in vol. 1 of The Loeb Classical Library edition of Philo (Harvard University Press 1929).
  • Plotinus (tr. A.H. Armstrong), The Enneads, in seven volumes (Loeb Classical Library: Harvard University Press 1966).
  • Porphyry (tr. K. Guthrie), Launching-Points to the Realm of Mind [Pros ta noeta aphorismoi] (Phanes Press 1988).
  • Porphyry (tr. A. Zimmern), Porphyry's Letter to His Wife Marcella Concerning the Life of Philosophy and the Ascent to the Gods (Phanes Press 1986).
  • Porphyry (tr. A.H. Armstrong), Life of Plotinus [Vita Plotini], in volume one of the Loeb Classical Library edition of Plotinus (Harvard University Press 1966).
  • Proclus (tr. T. Taylor), Lost Fragments of Proclus (Wizards Bookshelf 1988).
  • Proclus (tr. T. Taylor), Ten Doubts Concerning Providence, and On the Subsistence of Evil (Ares Publishers 1980).
  • Pseudo-Dionysius (tr. C. Luibheid 1987), Pseudo-Dionysius: The Complete Works (Paulist Press).

Author Information

Edward Moore
St. Elias School of Orthodox Theology
U. S. A.

Rāmānuja (c. 1017 - c. 1137)

Rāmānuja (ācārya), the eleventh century South Indian philosopher, is the chief proponent of Vishishtādvaita, which is one of the three main forms of the Orthodox Hindu philosophical school, Vedānta. As the prime philosopher of the Vishishtādvaita tradition, Rāmānuja is one of the Indian philosophical tradition’s most important and influential figures. He was the first Indian philosopher to provide a systematic theistic interpretation of the philosophy of the Vedas, and is famous for arguing for the epistemic and soteriological significance of bhakti, or devotion to a personal God. Unlike many of his contemporaries, Rāmānuja defended the reality of a plurality of individual persons, qualities, values and objects while affirming the substantial unity of all. On some accounts, Rāmānuja’s influence on popular Hindu practice is so vast that his system forms the basis for popular Hindu philosophy. His two main philosophical writings (the Shrī Bhāshya and Vedārthasangraha) are amongst the best examples of rigorous and energetic argumentation in any philosophical tradition, and they are masterpieces of Indian scholastic philosophy.

Table of Contents

  1. Ramanuja's Life and Works
  2. Ramanuja's Cosmology and Metaphysics
    1. Background
    2. Negative Philosophical Criticisms of Bhedabheda and Advaita Vedanta
      1. Logical Criticism
      2. Argument from Epistemology
    3. Substantive Theses
      1. Intentionality of Consciousness
      2. Consciousness is a Property of Something
      3. Individuals are Real
    4. Hermeneutic Criticism
      1. Vedas as Doctrinally Unified Corpus
      2. "Tat tvam asi" and Co-ordinate Predication
      3. Brahman and Atman
  3. Ramanuja's Theism
  4. Ramanuja's Soteriology
  5. Ramanuja's Epistemology
    1. Perception
    2. Scripture
    3. Bhakti
    4. Error
  6. Ramanuja's Ethics
    1. Substantive Ethics
    2. Foundations of Ethics
  7. Interpreting Ramanuja: the Northern and Southern Schools and the Authenticity of the Gadyas
  8. Conclusion: Ramanuja's Place in the History of Indian Philosophy
  9. References and Further Readings
    1. Primary Sources
    2. b. Secondary Sources on Ramanuja

1. Ramanuja's Life and Works

On traditional accounts, Ramanuja lived the unusually long life of 120 years (twice the average lifespan at the time), from 1017 to 1137 C.E., though recent scholarship places his life between 1077 to 1157 C.E., with a life of 80 years (Carman p.27). He was born in the Southern, Tamil speaking region of India, in the small township of Shri Perumbudur on the outskirts of modern day Chennai (Madras) into a family that hailed from a subclass of Brahmins (the Hindu priestly caste) known for their scholarship and learning in the Vedas. His family was likely bilingual, fluent in both the local vernacular (Tamil) and the language of scholarship (Sanskrit). From a young age he is reputed to have displayed a prodigious intellect and liberal attitudes towards caste. At this time he became friendly with a local, saintly Sudra (member of the servile caste) by the name of Kancipurna, whose occupation it was to perform services for the local temple idol of the Hindu deity Vishnu. Ramanuja admired Kancipurna's piety and devotion to Vishnu and sought Kancipurna as his guru-much to the horror of Kancipurna who regarded Ramanuja's humility before him as an affront to caste propriety.

Shortly after being married in his teenage years, and after his father passed away, Ramanuja and his family moved to the neighboring city of Kancipuram. There Ramanuja found his first formal teacher, Yadavaprakasha, who was an accomplished professor of the form of the Vedanta philosophy that was in vogue at the time-a form of Vedanta that has strong affinities to Shankara's Absolute Idealistic Monism (Advaita Vedanta) but was also close to the Difference-and-non-difference view (Bhedabheda Vedanta). ("Vedanta" means the 'end of the Vedas' and refers to the philosophy expressed in the end portion of the Vedas, also known as the Upanishads, and encoded in the cryptic summary by Badharayana called the Vedanta Sutra or Brahma Sutra. The perennial questions of Vedanta are: what is the nature of Brahman, or the Ultimate, and what is the relationship between the multiplicity of individuals to this Ultimate. Vedanta comprises one of the six orthodox schools of Hindu philosophy.)

At first Yadavaprakasha was thrilled to receive a talented and intelligent student of the likes of Ramanuja. But disagreements between the two, on the proper interpretation of the Upanishads, soon broke out. Yadavaprakasha favored an amoral, impersonal, non-theistic interpretation of the Upanishads. Ramanuja, in contrast, favored a theistic interpretation of the Upanishads that placed a premium on the aesthetic and moral excellences of Brahman. Yadavaprakasha found Ramanuja's skill at offering alternative interpretations threatening both to his authority and the popularity of his philosophy. He thus hatched a plan, with some of his other students, to murder Ramanuja while on a pilgrimage. Ramanuja however got word of the plan from his classmate and cousin (Govinda) and escaped from the pilgrimage with his life. Ramanuja (surprisingly) did not make public his knowledge of the failed assassination attempt and resumed classes with Yadavaprakasha when he returned to Kancipuram. Yadavaprakasha for his part did not reveal his complicity in the plot to take Ramanuja's life, and feigned happiness at continuing to be his teacher. Not too long afterwards, however, Yadavaprakasha ordered Ramanuja to leave his school, after a final disagreement on the interpretation of scripture occurred.

Without a teacher, Ramanuja returned dejected to his childhood mentor, Kancipurna, who assured him that a teacher would come his way. For the time being, Kancipurna instructed Ramanuja to help him in his manual service to the temple idol of Vishnu.

At the same time Yamuna, the spiritual head of the fledgling Tamil Vaishnava (Vishnu worshiping) community, was near the end of his life and in search of a successor. This community, known as the Shri Vaishnava Sampradaya, was formed around the memory of the Four Thousand Tamil Verses (Nalayira Divya Prabhandam) of twelve Tamil Vaishnava saints (Alvars), renowned for their devotional poetry on Vishnu. While it had a modest popular base, it lacked a formal and legitimizing articulation in the Sanskrit academic community. Though a competent and accomplished philosopher in his own right who authored the impressive Siddhi Trayam, Yamuna came into the fold too late in his life to fully articulate the philosophy of Shri Vaishnavas to the pan-Indian academic community. He thus held out the hope that Ramanuja would, amongst other things, take up the task of articulating the philosophical ethos of the tradition that had been entrusted to him, in the form of a formal, Sanskrit commentary on the Brahma Sutra (the cryptic summary of the philosophical purport of the Upanishads). Upon finding out that Ramanuja had been freed from ties to Yadavaprakasha, and had returned to the company of Kancipurna (himself a member of Yamuna's Shri Vaishnava community) Yamuna was overjoyed and sent word to Ramanuja to come and take up the post as his successor. Yamuna however died just before Ramanuja could reach him, and once again Ramanuja found himself without the teacher he had been searching for.

After Ramanuja had gained his composure, he made his way over to the crowd centered on Yamuna's new corpse. He noted that three fingers of Yamuna’s were curled. Yamuna's senior disciples explained to Ramanuja that they likely represented three wishes of Yamuna, one of which being that a commentary on the Brahma Sutra should be written. When Ramanuja pledged to try to fulfill those wishes, the fingers uncurled. The crowd took this as a sign that Ramanuja was the heir apparent of Yamuna. Ramanuja was however vexed at the local temple idol of Vishnu for not even allowing him a brief meeting with Yamuna, and would not formally join the community for nearly a year.

When Ramanuja did decide to formally join the Shri Vaishnava fold, Yamuna's senior disciple, Mahapurna, supervised his initiation. For a matter of six months, Ramanuja had found himself the teacher he was looking for in the form of Mahapurna. Under Mahapurna, Ramanuja learned the verses of the Tamil Vaishnava saints. However, his learning under Mahapurna came to an abrupt end when Ramanuja's wife picked a fight with Mahapurna’s wife, on the premise that the latter was a member of a lower Brahminic subcaste. Upon hearing this, the hurt Mahapurna and his wife departed from Ramanuja's company without notice. Ramanuja, once again lost his teacher. But this was not the first time that Ramanuja's wife had interfered with his spiritual development.

At an earlier point, Ramanuja had invited his childhood mentor, Kancipurna, for a meal. Ramanuja had hoped to partake of Kancipurna's leavings as a sacrament. However, Kancipurna arrived early in absence of Ramanuja. Ramanuja's wife fed Kancipurna, sent him off, and ritually purified the dining area, by, amongst other things, discarding Kancipurna's leftovers.

Having lost the benefits of a teacher twice over as a result of his wife's caste-pretensions, Ramanuja was incensed. He thus sent his wife back to her natal home, and promptly became a renounciate (sannyasin). He earned the title "king of ascetics (yatiraja) from the temple deity of Vishnu speaking through Kancipurna at this point.

Ramanuja's separation from his wife and his initiation into the order of ascetics marks the beginning of his career as an independent and self-assured philosopher. He traveled around India and participated in public debates with exponents of rival philosophies. Many of the philosophers that Ramanuja defeated became prominent disciples in his fold. Ramanuja standardized and reformed temple worship in those Vaishnava temples that he gained control over (often through winning debates with the custodians of the temple). To this day his instructions are the norm of Shri Vaishnava temple and home worship in India and abroad.

The Shri Vaishnava tradition is unanimous in holding that Ramanuja authored nine, and only nine, works: all in Sanskrit. While Ramanuja is reported by the writings of his disciples to have lectured in Tamil on the verses of the Tamil Vaishnava saints, he left no writings on their work, and no explicit mention of them in his writings. At first glance, this seems remarkable, given that the Divya Prabhandam is regarded by the Shri Vaishnava tradition, as the Tamil equivalent of the Vedas. However, Ramanuja's silence on the Alvars in his Sanskrit writings may have been a result of his aim as philosopher to not preach to the converted, but to articulate his philosophy to the pan-Indian academic community.

Ramanuja's first work was likely the Vedarthasangraha ('Summary of the Meaning of the Vedas'). It sets out Ramanuja’s philosophy, which is theistic (it affirms a morally perfect, omniscient and omnipotent God) and realistic (it affirms the existence and reality of a plurality of qualities, persons and objects). This work is referred to several times in Ramanuja's magnum opus, his commentary on the Brahma Sutra, the Shri Bhashya (also known as his Brahma Sutra Bhashya). This is the work that Ramanuja is best known by outside of the Shri Vaishnava tradition. In addition to this large commentary on the Brahma Sutra, Ramanuja apparently wrote two more shorter commentaries: Vedantapida, and Vedantasara. Aside from the Vedarthasangraha and Shri Bhashya, Ramanuja's most important philosophic work is a commentary on the Bhagavad Gita (Bhagavad Gita Bhashya). In addition to these philosophic works, Ramanuja is held by tradition to have written three prose hymns called collectively the Gadya Traya, which include the Sharanagati Gadya, Shriranga Gadya and the Vaikuntha Gadya). The Sharanagati Gadya is a dialogue between Ramanuja and the Hindu deities Shri (Lakshmi) and Narayana (Vishnu) (which jointly comprise God, or Brahman, for Ramanuja) in which Ramanuja surrenders himself before God and petitions Vishnu, through Lakshmi, for his Grace. Vishnu and Lakshmi, for their part, respond favorably to Ramanuja's act of surrender. The Shriranga Gadya is a prayer of surrender to the feet of Ranganatha. (This is Vishnu in his repose on the many headed serpent Adiœesa -'ancient servant,' ‘ancient residue,’ or ‘primeval matter'- on the milk ocean.) The Vaikuntha Gadya describes in great detail the eternal realm of Vishnu, called Vaikuntha, on which one should meditate in order to gain liberation. Finally Ramanuja is held to have authored a manual of daily worship called the Nityagrantha.

The authenticity of all but the three large works attributed to Ramanuja - Shri Bhashya, Vedarthasangraha and the Bhagavad Gita Bhashya - have come into question in recent times. The argument against the authenticity of these texts appears to be a minority position amongst scholars. With respect to the two smaller commentaries on the Brahma Sutra, it has been argued that they must be inauthentic, because it seems unlikely that Ramanuja would himself have bothered to take the time to abridge his larger commentary, the Shri Bhashya (cf. Buitenen p.32). With respect to the short religious works attributed to Ramanuja, it has been argued that they present doctrines that go beyond those that are found in his major commentaries (cf. Lester p.279).

2. Ramanuja's Cosmology and Metaphysics

a. Background

Subsequent tradition has applied the label "Vishishtadvaita" to the philosophy of Ramanuja. It is meant to contrast his philosophy from leading competing views, such as Advaita (Non-Dualist), Bhedabheda (Difference-and-non-difference) and Dvaita (Dualist) Vedanta. The term "Vishishtadvaita" is often translated as 'Qualified Non-Dualism.' An alternative, and more informative, translation is "Non-duality of the qualified whole," or perhaps 'Non-duality with qualifications.” The label attempts to mark out Ramanuja's effort to affirm the unity of the many, without giving up on the reality of distinct persons, qualities, universals, or aesthetic and moral values.

Where all versions of Vedanta intersect is in their effort to provide a consistent and defendable interpretation of the Brahma Sutra, on philosophical and hermeneutic grounds. Given the common textual bases, there are certain doctrinal invariances amongst the various sub-schools of Vedanta.

In accordance with the Upanishads, the various schools of Vedanta hold that there is an ultimate entity, called Brahman, which also is referred to by scripture as "Atma" (“Self”). The Vedanta schools recognize, in accordance with the Upanishads, that Brahman plays a key role in the organization of the universe. Attainment of Brahman by an individual constitutes its highest good: soteriological liberation or moksha.

The chief areas of disagreement amongst the various schools of Vedanta are on the nature and ontological status of individual selves, objects of cognition and Brahman, as well as the relevance and importance of ethics or duty (dharma) to the good life.

Ramanuja's foils in the articulation of his philosophy are two forms of Vedanta that were not clearly distinguished during his day: these are the Bhedabheda view, and the Advaita philosophy. Both these views take a similar stance on the relationship of an individual's subjectivity and Brahman: on both accounts, the conscious principle of the individual is of a piece with Brahman. In the case of Advaita Vedanta, the consciousness of an individual is regarded as numerically identical with the consciousness of Brahman. On this view, the psychological ego or sense of individuality is something distinct from consciousness: it is its object. The Bhedabheda view similarly asserts the numerical identity of an individual's consciousness and Brahman, but it emphasizes that this identity is counteracted by a separating off, or differentiating effort, on the part of Brahman to compartmentalize itself and mysteriously constitute the world of plurality and difference. On this view, the individual ego is constituted by Brahman. According to the versions of Bhedabheda and Advaita that Ramanuja was acquainted with, mere knowledge of one's identity with Brahman is sufficient to bring about liberation; works, such as ritual and moral obligations, can at best play a preparatory role in bringing an individual to the state of being desirous for liberation, but they have no intrinsic value. Corollaries of these views are the position that consciousness, and not plurality, is metaphysically fundamental; that consciousness does not require objects for its existence; that belief in plurality consists in the uncritical acceptance of ordinary experience; and that dialectical reasoning can yield substantive knowledge with practical import. On many fronts (on the reality of universals, particulars, and moral values) both the Bhedabheda Advaita schools are classic forms of anti-realism.

Students of Ramanuja's thought may wish to know whom Ramanuja is arguing against. In all likely hood, it is his former teacher, Yadavaprakasha. However, Ramanuja does not attribute the Advaita or Bhedabheda views to any particular philosopher. Rather, these views are voiced by the opponent, or the ubiquitous purvapaksin, everywhere in Indian philosophy, expressing the views to be criticized.

Ramanuja's arguments that he presents against his opponent are of roughly three varieties. Some are negative, and focus on philosophical problems of the opponent's view. Some are positive, and concern arguing for theses that Ramanuja wishes to defend. And some arguments are hermeneutic. This last category of arguments combines criticism and positive philosophical argument, but it centers on the proper interpretation of the Vedas.

b. Negative Philosophical Criticisms of Bhedabheda and Advaita Vedanta

i. Logical Criticism

Ramanuja criticizes many of the arguments of the Bhedabheda and Advaita views on logical grounds. These schools employed dialectical arguments that conclude on the basis of logical puzzles that arise in accounting for distinctions and difference in perception that difference (which includes the idea of a distinct quality) is an unintelligible notion. From such considerations, these philosophers would typically conclude that only undifferentiated consciousness is the real (Brahman). Ramanuja at many points in the Shri Bhashya and the Vedarthasangraha attempts to argue against such views by an argument ad absurdum. Particularly, Ramanuja argues that the arguments presented by the Bhedabheda and Advaita Vedantins lead to intolerable contradictions and further conclusions that go against common sense. At one point he suggests that those who would make such arguments are "no better than a man who would claim that his own mother never had any children" (Shri Bhashya, I.i.1. "Great Siddhanta" p.44).

ii. Argument from Epistemology

Ramanuja argues that the epistemic considerations that his opponents adduce for their positions undercut their own views. The philosophers that Ramanuja takes aim at argue that all means of cognition involve error. Ramanuja argues that if this is so, it follows that we could never know that all cognition involves error, for such putative knowledge would itself involve an erroneous cognition, and hence not qualify as genuine knowledge. If Ramanuja's opponents view is correct, then it follows that some cognitions are not erroneous. But this is exactly what the disputed conclusion rules out (Shri Bhashya, I.i.1. "Great Siddhanta" pp.74-78).

c. Substantive Theses

i. Intentionality of Consciousness

While the previous two strategies that Ramanuja employs in his criticism of the Bhedabheda and Advaita views are largely negative, and involve criticizing these views on formal grounds, Ramanuja also defends philosophical theses that these two schools rule out. The most important of these theses is the view that consciousness is always consciousness of some object distinguished by a characteristic (cf. Shri Bhashya, I.i.1. "Great Siddhanta" p.53 and "Great Purvapaksa" p.32). This is the doctrine known as "dharmabhutajnana" in the Vishishtadvaita tradition (Shrinivasadisa VII.2). It implies the view that all epistemic states, be it consciousness or perception, are intentional or object oriented. If it is the case that even consciousness requires an object for its existence, it follows that there can be no such thing as pure consciousness apart from difference (such as qualities, properties and objects of consciousness). Thus, on this account, if consciousness exists, it follows that difference and plurality does as well. With this one thesis, and against the backdrop of Vedantic idealism, Ramanuja is able to generate one limb of his organismic cosmology.

ii. Consciousness is a Property of Something

Another important substantive philosophical thesis that Ramanuja defends is that consciousness is itself a property. To modern readers, this may seem to be a trivial point. However, it is central to the project of Ramanuja's opponents that Brahman is the only reality, and it is a reality devoid of distinctions or qualities. Ramanuja's opponents are happy to affirm that certain things can be said of Brahman, for instance, that it is (as affirmed in the Taittitriya Upanishad II.i.1.) truth (satyam) knowledge (jnanam) and infinite (anantam). However, they take the stand that these are not properties of Brahman, but the very being of Brahman (Shri Bhashya, I.i.1. "Great Purvapaksa" p.29). Ramanuja, in contrast, defends the view that such attributions bring attention to the reality of Brahman's qualities (cf. Shri Bhashya, I.i.1. "Great Purvapaksa" p.28).

iii. Individuals are Real

A third and important substantive thesis that Ramanuja defends is the reality of the individual. According to Advaita Vedanta (and the Bhedabheda view to a lesser extent), the individual person, in contradistinction to other persons, is an illusion (maya) that comes about by nescience (avidya). Ramanuja argues that the very idea that something can be ignorant presumes that there is an individual capable of being ignorant. For all Vedantins affirm that Brahman is of the nature of consciousness and knowledge. Hence, to say that Brahman is ignorant is absurd. If anything is subject to ignorance, it must be an individual other than Brahman. However, if this is so, then ignorance cannot be brought into explain the existence of individuals, for it presumes the existence of an individual capable of being ignorant. Ramanuja's positive view is thus that there are, indeed, distinct individuals, many who are under the spell of ignorance. However, their individuality is ontologically and logically prior to their ignorance (Shri Bhashya, I.i.1. "Great Siddhanta" p.103)

d. Hermeneutic Criticism

All Vedanta philosophies must turn to the Vedas, and particularly the Upanishads, for scriptural grounding. Hence, in criticizing his fellow Vedantins, Ramanuja makes use of arguments that concern the proper interpretation of scripture.

i. Vedas as Doctrinally Unified Corpus

According to Ramanuja, his opponents have failed to arrive at an interpretation of the Vedas based on all Vedic texts. Rather, they emphasize some passages that support a monistic interpretation, and ignore those passages that either presume or emphasize plurality. Ramanuja notes that his opponents hold to the view that those Vedic texts that come later in the corpus are to be emphasized (the fact that they come later is presumed, on this account, to show that they contain the more advanced and esoteric teachings) (Shri Bhashya, I.i.1. "Great Purvapaksa" p.27). These, more than other portions of the Vedas, emphasize the oneness of reality with Brahman. Ramanuja argues that even these portions of the Vedas presume and affirm plurality. Even if it were not the case that these portions of the Vedas mentioned plurality, we would have to take all the Vedas on par for Ramanuja. According to Ramanuja, one cannot attempt to give interpretations of isolated portions of the Vedas. Rather, one must take the Vedas as one unified corpus, aiming at the expression of a single doctrine (cf. Shri Bhashya pp.92-3, I.i.1. "Great Siddhanta"). Hence, any tenable interpretation of the philosophy of the Vedas must not only affirm the reality of plurality, but also the importance of ritual and moral obligations (dharma), for these are spoken about at length in the earlier portions of the Vedas.

ii. "Tat tvam asi" and Co-ordinate Predication

Even if the Vedic corpus as a whole is taken to present a single doctrine, Ramanuja is still left with the task of accounting for how the seemingly monistic portions of the Upanishads are consistent with the reality of a plurality of distinct individuals. To overcome this hermeneutic hurdle, Ramanuja introduces the doctrine of samanadhikaranya, sometimes translated as "co-ordinate predication" or “the principle of grammatical coordination” but literally meaning 'several things in a common substrate.' The etymology of the word suggests an ontological doctrine. However, Ramanuja means to employ it as a semantic doctrine. According to Ramanuja, "The experts on such matters define it thus: `The signification of an identical entity by several terms [shabda] which are applied to that entity on different grounds is co-ordinate predication" (Vedarthasangraha §24).

In both the Shri Bhashya and the Vedarthasangraha, Ramanuja draws a distinction between the object denoted by a term, and the quality that it can be identified in connection with. The possibility of using various terms with the same denotation but with different qualitative content is what Ramanuja calls "co-ordinate predication."

The doctrine that Ramanuja advances under the heading of co-ordinate predication strikingly anticipates the Fregean distinction between sense and reference. In the writings of Ramanuja, the doctrine is used to interpret monistic passages of the Vedas in a manner that affirms both the unity of the thing designated, via the coreferentiality of the various terms, while affirming that the various terms bring to the sentence an emphasis on distinct properties of the unitary thing so identified. With respect to the famous formula "that thou art" (tat tvam asi) from the Chandyogai Upanishad (which Advaitins quote as support for the absolute identity of the individual's self with Brahman), Ramanuja understands the indexicals "that" and “thou” as signifying an underlying unity, while containing distinct qualitative content. Hence, "that" in this context, brings to fore the quality of the underlying substantial unity of all individuals in Brahman, while "thou" emphasize that we, as individuals, are qualities or distinctions in this underlying unity (Shri Bhashya, I.i.1. "Great Siddhanta" pp.129-39).

iii. Brahman and Atman

Even if the doctrine of co-ordinate predication is granted, there is yet another hermeneutic hurdle for Ramanuja to contend with: this is the Upanishadic equation of Brahman (the Ultimate) with Atma (or Self). If the Ultimate and the Self are one, then it would seem that there is no room for the existence of a plurality of individual persons. The problem might be solved by denying that "Atma" means self, but this would be to stipulate a meaning for the word "Atma" that it does not have in Sanskrit or Vedic. Ramanuja's solution to this problem is the cosmological doctrine of sharira and shariri (body and soul), or shesha and sheshin (dependant and dependant upon). According to Ramanuja, Brahman is the Self of all. However, this is not because our individual personhood is identical with the personhood of Brahman, but because we, along with all individuals, constitute modes or qualities of the body of Brahman. Thus, Brahman stands to all others as the soul or mind stands to its body. The metaphysical model that Ramanuja thus argues for is at once cosmological in nature, and organic. All individuals are Brahman by virtue of constituting its body, but all individuals retain an identity in contradistinction to other parts of Brahman, particularly the soul of Brahman.

In accordance with much of the monism of Upanishadic passages, Ramanuja maintains that there is a way in which the individual self (jiva, or jivatma) is identical with the Ultimate Self (Atma or Paramatma). This is in our natures. According to Ramanuja, each jiva shares with Brahman an essential nature of being a knower. However, due to beginningless past actions (karma) our true nature (as being knowers and dependants upon Brahman) are obscured from us. Moreover, our sharing this nature in no way implies that we have the same relationship to other things (Shri Bhashya, I.i.1. "Great Siddhanta" pp.99-102). In other words, our likeness in one respect with Brahman does not imply that we ourselves are either omnipotent, omniscient or all good.

3. Ramanuja's Theism

In contrast to preceding commentators on the Brahma Sutra, Ramanuja's version of Vedanta is explicitly theistic. Brahman as Atman (the Highest Self of all) is the union of two deities: Vishnu, or Narayana, and His Consort Shri, or Lakshmi. (In Hinduism, Vishnu is the God who upholds and preserves all things, while Lakshmi is the Goddess of prosperity.) The unity of both the father (Vishnu) and mother (Lakshmi) element in Brahman is essential to Ramanuja. It is a consequence of the view that Brahman is ubhayalingam, or having both sexes: this accounts for Brahman's creative potency. According to Ramanuja, Brahman (considered as the Atman) is antagonistic to all evil lacks all faults (papam, heya, mala or dosha), and is comprised of innumerable auspicious qualities (kalyanaguna): these auspicious qualities are both moral and aesthetic (Vedarthasangraha §§ 2, 6, 9, 19, 92, 112, 147, 161, 163, 198, 234, Shri Bhashya, I.i.1. pp.5, 80, 89, 92, 94, 125, 132, 133, 136, 144, I.i.2. p. 157, I.i.4. p.201, Bhagavad Gita Bhashya I. Intro, IX.34, to name just a few references-Ramanuja never tires or speaking of God's excellences.).

The highest Self (Atma) stands to all other persons as their parent, on Ramanuja's account. However, Ramanuja, like many Vedantins, does not subscribe to the Medieval Christian doctrine of creation ex nihilo: Brahman does not create individual persons, or basic, non-relational qualities for that matter, for these are eternal features of its Body. Brahman does engage in a form of creation, which consists in granting individual persons the fruits of their desires (whatever they are). The result of this dispensation is the organization of the elements comprising Brahman's body into the cosmos (Shri Bhashya, I.i.1. "Great Siddhanta" p.124)

4. Ramanuja's Soteriology

On Ramanuja's account, our greatest good consists of being ever aware of our true nature (as modes of Brahman) and of being aware of the nature of Brahman. When all impediments to this awareness are removed, the individual attains moksha (liberation). Knowledge of Brahman consists in liberation, for Ramanuja, mainly because of the character of Brahman. He writes:

Entities other than Brahman can be objects of such cognitions of the nature of joy only to a finite extent and for limited duration. But Brahman is such that cognizing of him is an infinite and abiding joy. It is for this reason that the shruti [scripture] says, `Brahman is bliss' (Taittitriya Upanishad II.6.) Since the form of cognition as joy is determined by its object, Brahman itself is joy. (Vedarthasangraha §241)

Ramanuja is explicit in holding that theoretical knowledge of Brahman's nature will not suffice to procure liberation (Shri Bhashya, I.i.1. "Small Siddhanta" pp.13-14). Our embodied state places psychological constraints upon us that must be nullified. The remedy to be employed, for Ramanuja, is what he calls, after the Bhagavad Gita, bhakti yoga, or the discipline of devotion or worship. This type of yoga is comprised of two essential elements: (a) an attendance to one's duties with a deontological sense that they are the things that ought to be done for their own sake, and not for their consequences (also known as karma yoga), and (b) the constant worship of Brahman, particularly in the form of offering all of the fruits of one's labor to Brahman. These features of bhakti yoga serve two complimentary purposes. First, they counteract past undesirable actions (karmas) whose residual effects impede a full appreciation of reality. Secondly, they inculcate subservience before Brahman. This is valuable for Ramanuja, for service to God, on his account, is constitutive of an unbroken appreciation of Brahman's nature.

5. Ramanuja's Epistemology

Epistemic concerns figure centrally in Ramanuja's arguments, and his diagnosis of the state of bondage (samsara), or non-liberation. Like many Indian philosophers, Ramanuja holds that liberation comes about by the cessation of nescience (Shri Bhashya, I.i.1. "Small Siddhanta" p.12). However, unlike many of his contemporaries, Ramanuja does not believe that reason is an independent means of knowledge, capable of dispelling ignorance.

a. Perception

Ramanuja holds a position that is similar to naïve empiricism. According to naïve empiricism, the only knowledge that one can have is knowledge that one has gained by one's own experience. Ramanuja’s view is like naïve empiricism, in so far as his intentional account of the nature of all epistemic states (dharmabhutajnana) leads him to the view that all genuine or first-rate knowledge (jnana) consists in a perceptual relationship between a knower and an object of knowledge-knowledge de re-and not between a believer and a sentence or proposition-knowledge de dicto. Unlike some proponents of naïve empiricism, Ramanuja does not think that it suffices to intermittently have an acquaintance with objects of knowledge. Knowledge (jnana) only occurs when there is direct perception of an object. Unlike proper empiricists, Ramanuja does not restrict knowledge to that which can be gathered from the senses. The individual self (jiva) on Ramanuja's account is also capable of having a direct vision of transcendent entities, like Brahman. Yet, the character of the epistemic state in which one is acquainted with Brahman is a type of perception for Ramanuja.

b. Scripture

Because of Ramanuja's perceptual conception of knowledge, he does not regard acquaintance with scripture (shruti) as anything more than knowledge of the sentence meaning of scripture (cf. Shri Bhashya, I.i.1. "Small Siddhanta" pp.13-14). Yet, like many of his fellow Vedantins, Ramanuja regards scripture (shruti) as a pramana, or a means of knowledge. shruti, or the revealed literature, consists of a very specific corpus of texts: the Vedas. (If Ramanuja believed that the Divya Prabhandam authored by the Tamil Vaishnava saints is the Tamil equivalent of the Vedas, then he would have held these to also be within the purview of shruti). Scripture is an important source of knowledge, for Ramanuja, for it is the only place that we can learn of our moral obligations (dharma) and what our liberation consists in (moksha). On the basis of the validity of scripture, several texts gain a derivative authority. These texts are smriti (remembered) texts, which include the law books (dharmashastras) of eminent figures, and seemingly sacred texts like the Bhagavad Gita. On the question of the justification of taking scripture seriously, Ramanuja holds that none can be given. Scripture is self-justifying. Scripture, for its part, can lead people to have cognitions of independent entities, such as Brahman, after providing them directions to perceive Brahman: without it one would never know what to look for. However, sensuous perception cannot vouch for the veracity of its contents, nor can reason independently provide a rational proof of its veracity. Having followed scripture's dictates, one will eventually have proof of its validity (Shri Bhashya I.i.4. p.175) (direct perceptual contact with objects such as Brahman). However, prior to embarking on the journey outlined in scripture, it must be taken on faith alone. Thus, on the position of the validity of scripture, Ramanuja is a fideist (see Shri Bhashya I.i.3. for Ramanuja's classic criticism of natural theology pp.162-74). (Some critics are apt to think that Ramanuja is correct on the ungroundability of the validity of scripture on either sensuous perception or reason, but that this impossibility makes Ramanuja's whole philosophy implausible.)

While according scripture great weight, Ramanuja shows his preference for common sense by tempering his interpretations of scripture in light of ordinary, sensuous experience. Contrary to the dialectically minded philosophers of his day, Ramanuja presumes in his defense of Vishishtadvaita in the Shri Bhashya (I.i.1.) that scriptural interpretation must accord with ordinary experience.

c. Bhakti

Ramanuja's unique contribution to Indian epistemology is the view that bhakti, or devotion, is itself an epistemic state. We have noted that, for Ramanuja, knowledge of Brahman consists in directly perceiving it. When bhakti takes firm root in an individual, it turns into parabhakti, which is the highest order of bhakti. In all cases, however, bhakti is a direct awareness of Brahman's nature, and thus constitutes a type of knowledge (jnana) (Vedarthasangraha §238). The perceptual character of bhakti is sometimes obscured by Ramanuja's synonyms for this state. He sometimes calls it meditation or worship (upasana). However, he also insists that it is a kind of seeing, which has the character of direct perception (pratyakshata or sakshatkara) (cf. Shri Bhashya, I.i.1. "Small Purvapaksha" pp.15-7).

d. Error

Ramanuja's object oriented account of knowledge has the problem of accounting for error. If knowledge corresponds to objects, what do false beliefs correspond to: mental objects? His response anticipates Bertrand Russell's account of error in On Denoting, which does away with ersatz objects in the explanation of error. According to Ramanuja, erroneous experiences, like dream states, are real, and they can be genuine objects of knowledge (as in the statement 'I dreamt last night' or 'I am dreaming’). However, the objects that the experience claims to be about are absent in false cognitions. This absence of the proper objects of knowledge explains the erroneousness of beliefs in them (Shri Bhashya I.i.1. "Great Siddhanta" p.78). Thus, on Ramanuja's account, mistaking mother of pearl for a piece of silver does not consist in mistakenly seeing something silver in color, but in the mistaken cognition that the object perceived is a piece of silver.

6. Ramanuja's Ethics

Ramanuja's ethics divides into his views on substantive matters, and metaethical issues.

a. Substantive Ethics

Ramanuja's substantive ethics in turn has two sources. Like other orthodox Hindu thinkers, Ramanuja holds that the primary source of moral knowledge is the Vedas. This is particularly true of the earlier portion of the Vedas, which sets forth prescribed and optional works (karmas) that constitute dharma. The importance of dharma, derived from the Vedas, is stressed in all three of Ramanuja's major works. Like other orthodox Hindu thinkers, Ramanuja also holds that the venerable tradition, or smriti literature, supplements the Vedic texts' account of dharma. The most important of the smriti texts, for Ramanuja, is the Bhagavad Gita.

The Gita emphasizes the importance of adopting a deontological attitude (concern for duty for duty's sake and not for its consequences) in order to perfect the execution of prescribed duties, particular to one's place in society. But the Gita also emphasizes the importance of certain virtues. The Gita praises being a friend (mitra) and showing compassion (karuna) to all creatures (Bhagavad Gita XII.13), and enumerates ahimsa, or non-injury, as one of the virtues essential to having jnana, or gnosis (Bhagavad Gita XIII.7-11).

On what is to be done when the requirements of virtues conflict with prescribed duties, Ramanuja is uncompromising. For Ramanuja, dharma, as set forth in the Vedas, is inviolable. This puts Ramanuja in the awkward position of having to defend the propriety of animal sacrifices, sanctioned and prescribed in the earlier portion of the Vedas. Shri Vaishnava Brahmins, as a rule, are vegetarians. Ramanuja was, in all likelihood, himself a vegetarian. However, his general inclination to positively endorse the Bhagavad Gita's disavowal of animal cruelty did not stop him from affirming the propriety of animal sacrifices. In this respect, Ramanuja agrees with his Advaitin predecessor, Shankara, who held that while violence in general is evil, ritual slaughter is not any ordinary act of violence: because it is sanctioned by the Vedas, it cannot be evil (Shankara, Brahma Sutra Bhashya, III.i.25). Ramanuja however goes further and argues that ritual slaughter is not only not evil; it is also not really a form of violence. Rather, it is a healing act like a physician's procedure, which causes temporary pain but is ultimately to the benefit of the patient. The sacrificed animal, on Ramanuja's account, is more than compensated in the next life for being ritually slaughtered (Shri Bhashya, III.i.25. pp.599-600).

b. Foundations of Ethics

Ramanuja's metaethical comments concern the ground and validity of morality. Ramanuja seems to have always presumed that morality is intrinsically valuable. The intrinsic merit of God Himself, on Ramanuja's account, is tied to His moral excellences. Given that God has nothing to gain by being moral, the value of morality, at least in God's case, cannot be instrumental. However, for all other creatures, morality, or dharma, has an instrumental value: it helps counteract consequences of past karmas. Importantly, it is also the easy way to propitiate God. Ramanuja notes that, in theory, it is possible to achieve liberation through mental efforts alone. However, this is only a theoretical possibility, and is in reality impossible for creatures like us. jnana yoga, or mental disciplines geared towards achieving liberation by solely meditating upon the Self (and not availing oneself of ancillary aids, like attendance to one's duties) is difficult and likely to lead to error. Karma yoga, or attendance to one's duties, on the other hand, is easy for our duties are those obligations suited to our capacities and nature (Ramanuja Gita Bhashya, XVIII.47 p.583). Morality, on Ramanuja's account, has both intrinsic and instrumental value. This account of the instrumental value of our obligations also contains, within it, the seeds of an account of the validity of our obligations: our obligations are those appropriate acts that are suited to us to perform. Thus, morality is not simply a law imposed from outside, on Ramanuja's account, but the best mode of action, given our personal natures. However, because of our context, we are unable to determine what is best for us, independently of scripture. Hence, our reliance on scripture to tell us our duties leads to the appearance that dharma is a law imposed on us from outside.

Dharma (duty or morality) is of the utmost importance for Ramanuja. It thus might seem ironic that the Bhagavad Gita itself advises us to give up our dharmas. At the very end of the work, after the importance and benefits of living the virtuous life are extolled, Krishna (the incarnation of Vishnu delivering a sermon in the Bhagavad Gita) advises us to 'give up all dharmas' and seek refuge in Him alone (Bhagavad Gita XVIII.66). Ramanuja offers two interpretations of this verse: (1) it can be taken as implying that we are to abandon the sense of agency that is incompatible with our cosmological dependence upon God, or (2), it can be taken as implying that we ought to give up recourse to expiatory rituals (sometime called "dharmas") to nullify the effects of past actions. Neither interpretation allows for abandoning our prescribed obligations (Ramanuja, Bhagavad Gita Bhashya XVIII.66, p.599). Ramanuja's views contrast sharply with the views of the Advaita Vedantin Shankara, who argues that morality (dharma) for the seeker of liberation (moksha) is an evil, for it ensnares a person in things of the world (Shankara, Bhagavad Gita Bhashya, IV:21 pp.202-203).

7. Interpreting Ramanuja: the Northern and Southern Schools and the Authenticity of the Gadyas

Within two centuries after Ramanuja, the Shri Vaishnava tradition split into two separate sub-traditions. Both schools claim to have the authority of Ramanuja in support of their views. These traditions are the Northern or Vadakalai school, and the Southern or Tenkalai school. The respective founding figures of these schools are Vedanta Deshika and Manavalamamuni, two of many eminent Shri Vaishnava scholars to follow Ramanuja. One manner in which the Northern and Southern schools differ is with respect to the importance that the Vedas are to play in the devotees life: the Northern school holds that Vedic observances are essential to proper Shri Vaishnava practices, while the Southern school emphasises the importance of emulating the examples of the twelve Alvars. Most importantly, the two schools differ on the relationship between divine grace and individual effort. Both schools agree that Grace is necessary for liberation, but they disagree as to the conditions under which Grace is dispensed. According to the Northern school, Grace is conditional on the effort of the individual. Liberation, on this view, is a cooperative effort between God and the aspirant. According to the Southern school, Grace is dispensed freely. Liberation, on this view, is the sole responsibility of God. (On some accounts, the two schools can also be defined with respect to eighteen points of difference. See Govindacarya for one of the few but regrettably unbalanced accounts of this controversy).

Both schools agree that the intercession of Grace is tied to the devotee performing the spiritual act of sharanagati or prapatti-surrender before God. The act of prapatti, or the formal surrender to God, with the understanding that one has no other refuge, is central to Shri Vaishnava cultic life. However, Northern and Southern schools differ with respect to what is to follow. For the Southern school, a one-time act of prapatti is sufficient. Subsequent lapses in devotion or attitude do not alter God's disposition to save the individual. However, for the Northern school, lapses on the part of the devotee require a fresh commitment on the part of the individual to surrender before God, in addition to constant effort on the part of the individual to attend to their moral duties in the spirit of bhakti yoga.

The controversy between the two schools could be circumvented if it could be shown that the very doctrine of sharanagati or prapatti is foreign to the thought of Ramanuja. This is what some recent scholars have attempted to show. Robert C. Lester, following the arguments of the Vadakalai Shri Vaishnava scholar, Agnihothram Ramanuja Thatachariar of Kumbakonam, argues that the doctrine of sharanagati or prapatti, at the heart of latter day Shri Vaishnava controversy, is only found in the Sharanagati Gadya and the Shriranga Gadya, and are absent from Ramanuja's main philosophic works. On this basis, Lester argues that the Gadyas (specifically the Sharanagati Gadya and Shriranga Gadya) and the doctrine of sharanagati or prapatti are spurious.

According to this argument, the Gadyas present, for the first time, the view that surrendering to God constitutes a unique means of gaining liberation. And, moreover, Lester argues that this idea is foreign to the arguments that Ramanuja presents in the Shri Bhashya, the Vedarthasangraha and the Gita Bhashya. These works are unanimous in stressing the role of bhakti as both the beginning and end of liberation.

In defence of the authenticity of the Gadyas, one might argue that the very idea of bhakti contains with in it the notion of sharanagati-that to love or be devoted to God is to surrender oneself to God. However, Lester argues that the notion of bhakti promulgated in the three main works of Ramanuja is distinct from the notion of prapatti or sharanagati in the Gadyas. First, the Sharanagati Gadya makes it clear that the devotee is seeking God, not out of love, but out of desperation, with the request that God grant the devotee bhakti, and the favour of being eternally in His service. Sharanagati or prapatti thus constitutes an act that is logically distinct from what is involved in bhakti, which is the steady remembrance of God, and attendance to one's duties in a spirit of sacrifice. Secondly, the Gadyas have suggested to many that the act of surrendering to God is sufficient to procure liberation. The critic persuaded by Lester's view holds that such a view is nowhere to be found in Ramanuja's three main works.

In response to Lester's arguments, one might take a holistic stance: the import of the Gadyas and Ramanuja's larger works must be assessed together. This is the stand that has been traditionally adopted by Shri Vaishnavas of both schools. If this approach is adopted, one is likely to read Ramanuja's account of bhakti as implying an implicit understanding of our dependence and helplessness before God (a view shared by both the Northern and Southern schools), and one may also regard the Gadyas as not putting forth the radical notion that the act of surrender is sufficient for liberation (this, however, is what the Southern school appears to be committed to). With respect to Ramanuja's main works, there is clear textual evidence that he regarded individuals as impotent, apart from God (cf. Shri Bhashya, II.i.34. pp.478-9). As noted, on Ramanuja's account, God’s role as creator is to grant us the fruits of our desires. Without God actually acting on our behalf to simulate a world in which it seems as if we are doers, we would be nothing but isolated persons with many desires, and largely incorrect beliefs, cut off from our peers, with no way to work through our predilections. God's creative role, on this account, serves the purpose of bridging the gap between ourselves and the rest of reality. On this picture of the human condition, it is quite clear that we as individuals are literally helpless, but for the creative dispensation of God.

Another response to Lester's argument is to invoke Ramanuja’s own doctrine of co-ordinate predication, while defending the view that Ramanuja in his main works holds that prapatti is sufficient for liberation. Ramanuja in the Vedarthasangraha writes:

The heart of the whole shastra [body of authoritative texts] is this: The individual selves are essentially of the nature of pure knowledge, devoid of restriction and limitation. They get covered up by nescience in the shape of karma. The consequence is that the scope and breadth of their knowledge is curtailed in accordance with their karma. They get embodied in the multifarious varieties of bodies from [the deity] Brahma down to, the lowest species. Their knowledge is limited in accordance with their specific embodiment. They are deluded into identification with their bodies. In accordance with them they become subject to joys and sorrows, which, in essence constitute what is termed "the river of transmigratory existence" [samsara]. For these individual selves, so lost in samsara, there is no way of emancipation, other than surrender to the supreme Lord [bhagavatprapattimanthrena]. For the purpose of inculcating that sole way of emancipation, the first truth to be taught by the shastra is that the individual souls are not intrinsically divided into several kinds, like gods, men, etc., and that they are fundamentally alike and are equal in having knowledge as their essential nature. The essential nature of the individual self is such that it is wholly subservient and instrumental to God and therefore God is its inner self. The nature of the supreme Being is unique, on, account of his absolute perfection and absolute antithesis to everything that is evil. God is the ocean of countless, infinitely excellent attributes. The shastras further assert that all sentient and non sentient entities are sustained and operated by the supreme Being. Therefore, the Supreme is the ultimate self of all. They teach meditation along with its accessory conditions as the means for attaining him. (Vedarthasangraha §99, my italics)

It is noteworthy that while Ramanuja avails himself of the notion that surrendering to God is the only way to emancipation, he is also clear to emphasise that disciplines such as "meditation" and accessory conditions are essential to attaining liberation. One might argue, thus, that Ramanuja did hold that prapatti or sharanagati are the "only" way to liberation, but this way is not substantially distinct from the way of bhakti yoga. Rather, "bhakti" and “prapatti” are distinct qualities that qualify one path. On this interpretation, Ramanuja is assuming that the reader will appreciate the phenomenon of co-ordinate predication, which is the putative semantic phenomenon that Ramanuja appeals to elsewhere to argue that all individuals are Brahman, while being essentially distinct modes or attributes of Brahman, and not identical to the totality of Brahman. In this way, prapatti and bhakti both denote the same path, but they emphasize different points along the path.

8. Conclusion: Ramanuja's Place in the History of Indian Philosophy

Ramanuja stands in the Indian philosophical tradition as one of its most important figures. He is the first thinker in this tradition to provide a systematic theistic interpretation of the import of the Vedas. His uncompromising stand on the side of common sense and moral realism stands as a striking contrast to stereotyped accounts of Indian philosophical thought as otherworldly and amoral. And while his significance in the history of Indian philosophy may be under appreciated, his greater influence on the character and form of popular Hinduism may also be under-recognized, despite the fact that he is regarded as a saint in many parts of Southern India. According to Karl Potter, "…Ramanuja's tradition can be said to represent one of the main arteries through which philosophy reached down to the masses, and it may be that Vishishtadvaita is today the most powerful philosophy in India in terms of numbers of adherents, whether they know themselves by that label or not" (Potter p.253). Whether Potter is correct or not, Ramanuja is an Indian philosopher who defended the symbiosis of the spiritual, moral and practically earnest life.

9. References and Further Readings

a. Primary Sources

  • (Page number references for Ramanuja's Shri Bhashya are to the English translation.)
  • Ramanuja (acarya) (11th Century). Shri Bhashyam (Critical Edition). Melkote: Academy of Sanskrit Research, 1985.
  • Ramanuja (acarya) (11th Century). Shri Ramanuja Gita Bhashya (Bhagavad Gita Bhashya.) Trans. and Ed. Svami Adidevananda. Madras: Sri Ramakrishna Math, 1991.
  • Ramanuja (acarya) (11th Century). Shrimad Bhagavad Ramanuja Granthamala. (Complete works.) Ed. Prativadi Bhayankara Annangaracharya. Kancheepuram: available at Granthamala Karyalaya, 1974.
  • Ramanuja (acarya) (11th Century). Vedanta Sutras with the Commentary of Ramanuja (Shri Bhashya). Trans. (English) George Thibaut. Sacred Books of the East. Vol. 48. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass, 1996.
  • Ramanuja (acarya) (11th Century).Vedarthasamgraha (Vedarthasangraha). Trans. and Ed. S.S. Ragavachar. Mysore: Shri RamaKrishna Ashrama, 1968.
  • Russell, Bertrand (20th Century). "On Denoting." Mind 14.56 (1905): 479-93.
  • Shankara (acarya) (9th Century). Bhagavadgita with the Commentary of Shankaracarya (Bhagavad Gita Bhashya). Trans. and Ed. Swami Gambhirananda. Calcutta: Advaita Ashrama, 1991.
  • Shankara (acarya) (9th Century). Brahma Sutra Bhashya. Trans. Swami Gambhirananda. Calcutta: Advaita Ashrama, 1983.
  • Shrinivasadasa (17th Century). Yatidramatadipika. Trans. Svami Adidevananda. Madras: Sri Ramakrishna Math, 1978.
  • Yamuna (acarya) (11th Century). Sri Yamunacharya's Siddhi Trayam. Trans. K. Shrinivasacharya. Ed. R. Ramanujachari: N.p., 1970.

b. Secondary Sources on Ramanuja

  • Buitenen, J. A. B. van. "Introduction." Trans. J. A. B. van Buitenen. Ramanuja's Vedarthasangraha. Ed. J. A. B. van Buitenen. 1st , reprint. ed. Pune: Deccan College Postgraduate and Research Institute, 1956. viii, 316.
  • Carman, John B. The Theology of Ramanuja; an Essay in Interreligious Understanding. Yale Publications in Religion, 18. New Haven: Yale University Press, 1974.
  • Govindacarya, A. "The Astadasa-Bedas, or the Eighteen Points of Doctrinal Differences Between the Tengalais (Southerners) and the Vadagalais (Northerners) of the Vishishtadvaita Vaishnava School, South India." Journal of the Royal Asiatic Society of Great Britain and Ireland (1910): 1103-12.
  • Lester, Robert C. "Ramanuja and Shri Vaishnavism: the Concept of Prapatti or Sharanagati." History of Religion 5.2 (1966): 266-82.
  • Potter, Karl H. Presuppositions of India's Philosophies. Prentice-Hall Philosophy Series. Englewood Cliffs, N.J.: Prentice-Hall, 1963.
  • Tapasyananda. Bhakti Schools of Vedanta. Madras: Ramakrishna Math, 1990.

Author Information

Shyam Ranganathan
York University

Hans Reichenbach (1891—1953)

Hans Reichenbach was a leading philosopher of science, a founder of the Berlin circle, and a proponent of logical positivism (also known as neopositivism or logical empiricism). He is known for his philosophical investigations of Einstein's theory of relativity, quantum mechanics, the theory of probability, the nature of space and time, the character of physical laws, and conventionalism in physical science.

He was a critic of the Kantian theory of the synthetic a priori. Reichenbach complained that Kant and Poincaré should more carefully have distinguished mathematical geometry [that is, pure, a priori geometry] from physical geometry [that is, applied, synthetic geometry]. Mathematical geometry is about abstract objects in mathematical space; physical geometry is about physical objects in physical space. Kant and Poincaré failed to appreciate that it is the complete package of physics, coordinating definitions, and mathematical geometry that is compared to observation in order to select the appropriate physical geometry, said Reichenbach. This geometry cannot be selected a priori, as Kant wanted, nor by convention, as Poincaré wanted. When the package is in fact compared to observation the proper geometry is non-Euclidean geometry, as Einstein was the first to discover. In addition, developing an idea of Leibniz's, Reichenbach created a detailed theory whose goal is to explain the direction of time in terms of the direction from causes to their effects.

His methods of teaching philosophy were something of a novelty; students found him easy to approach (this fact was uncommon in German universities); and his courses were open to discussion and debate. In 1930, he and Carnap became the editors of the influential philosophical journal Erkenntnis.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. The Philosophy of Space and Time and the Philosophical Meaning of the Theory of Relativity
    1. Space
    2. Time
    3. The Special Theory of Relativity
    4. The General Theory of Relativity
    5. The Reality of Space and Time
  3. Quantum Mechanics
    1. Interpretation of Quantum Physics: Part I
    2. Mathematical Formulation of Quantum Mechanics
    3. Examples of Quantum Operators
    4. Classical and Quantum Physical Quantities; Schrodinger Equations
    5. Heisenberg Indeterminacy Principle
    6. The Interpretation of Quantum Physics: Part II
  4. Reichenbach's Epistemology
    1. The Structure of Science and the Verifiability Principle
    2. Conventionalism vs. Empiricism
    3. Causality
    4. Science and Philosophy
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Life

Hans Reichenbach was born on September 26th 1891 in Hamburg, Germany. He was a leading philosopher of science, a founder of the Berlin circle, and a proponent of logical positivism (also known as neopositivism or logical empiricism). He studied physics, mathematics and philosophy at Berlin, Erlangen, Gottingen and Munich in the 1910s. Among his teachers were the neo-Kantian philosopher Ernst Cassirer, the mathematician David Hilbert, and the physicists Max Planck, Max Born and Albert Einstein. Reichenbach received his degree in philosophy from the University at Erlangen in 1915; his dissertation on the theory of probability was published in 1916. He attended Einstein's lectures on the theory of relativity at Berlin in 1917-20; at that time Reichenbach chose the theory of relativity as the first subject for his own philosophical research. He became a professor at Polytechnic at Stuttgart in 1920. In the same year he published his first book on the philosophical implications of the theory of relativity, The Theory of Relativity and A Priori Knowledge, in which Reichenbach criticized Kantian theory of the synthetic a priori. In the following years he published three books on the philosophical meaning of the theory of relativity: Axiomatization of the theory of Relativity (1924), From Copernicus to Einstein (1927) and The Philosophy of Space and Time (1928); the last in a sense states logical positivism's view on the theory of relativity. In 1926 Reichenbach became a professor of philosophy of physics at the University at Berlin. His methods of teaching philosophy were something of a novelty; students found him easy to approach (this fact was uncommon in German universities); his courses were open to discussion and debate. In 1928 he founded the Berlin circle (named Die Gesellschaft fur empirische Philosophie, "Society for empirical philosophy"). Among the members of the Berlin circle were Carl Gustav Hempel, Richard von Mises, David Hilbert and Kurt Grelling. In 1930 Reichenbach and Carnap undertook the editorship of the journal Erkenntnis ("Knowledge").

In 1933 Adolf Hitler became Chancellor of Germany. In the same year Reichenbach emigrated to Turkey, where he became chief of the Department of Philosophy at the University at Istanbul. In Turkey, Reichenbach promoted a shift in philosophy courses; he introduced interdisciplinary seminars and courses on scientific subjects. Then in 1935 he published The theory of Probability.

In 1938 he moved to the United States, where he became a professor at the University of California at Los Angeles; in the same year he published Experience and Prediction. Reichenbach's work on quantum mechanics was published in 1944 (Philosophic foundations of quantum mechanics). Afterwards he wrote two popular books: Elements of symbolic logic (1947) and The rise of scientific philosophy (1951). In 1949 he contributed an essay on The philosophical significance of the theory of relativity to Albert Einstein: philosopher-scientist edit by Paul Arthur Schillp. Reichenbach died on April 9th 1953 at Los Angeles, California, while he was working on the philosophy of time. Two books Nomological statements and admissible operations (1954) and The direction of time (1956) were published posthumously.

2. The Philosophy of Space and Time and the Philosophical Meaning of the Theory of Relativity

a. Space

Euclidean geometry is based on the set of axioms stated by Greek mathematician Euclid who developed geometry into an axiomatic system, in which every theorem is derivable from the axioms. Euclid's work revealed that the truth of geometry depends on the truth of axioms and therefore the question arose whether the axioms were true. Many Euclidean axioms were self-evident, but the axiom of parallels, which states that there is one and only one parallel to a given line through a given point, was considered not self-evident, and many mathematicians tried to derive it from the other axioms. Eventually it was proved the axiom of parallels is not a logical consequence of the remainder. As a result of this research non-Euclidean geometries were discovered and mathematicians became aware of the existence of a plurality of geometries, namely:

  • Euclidean geometry, in which the axiom of parallels is true;
  • geometry of Bolyai and Lobachevsky, also known as hyperbolic geometry, in which there is an infinite number of parallels to the given line through the given point (Janos Bolyai (1802-1860), Hungarian mathematician, published in 1832 the first account of a non-Euclidean geometry; Nikolay Lobachevsky (1793-1856), Russian mathematician, independently discovered hyperbolic geometry);
  • elliptical geometry, in which there exist no parallel.

In Reichenbach's opinion, it must be realized that there are two different kinds of geometry, namely mathematical geometry and physical geometry. Mathematical geometry, a branch of mathematics, is a purely formal system and it does not deal with the truth of axioms, but with the proof of theorems. That is, it only produces the consequences of axioms. Physical geometry is concerned with the real geometry, that is, the geometry which is true in our physical world: it searches for the truth (or falsity) of axioms, using the methods of empirical science: experiments, measurements, and so forth; it is a branch of physics.

How can physicists discover the geometry of the real world? Look at the following example, which Reichenbach analyses in The philosophy of space and time. Two-dimensional intelligent beings live in a two-dimensional world, on the surface of a sphere, but they do not know where they live; in their opinion, they might live on a plane, a sphere or whatever surface. How can they discover where they live? They could use some mathematical properties that characterize a geometry; for example, in Euclidean geometry the ratio of the circumference of a circle to its diameter equals pi (3.14...) while in elliptical geometry the ratio is variable and it is less than pi; also in hyperbolic geometry the ratio is variable but greater than pi. Therefore they could measure the circumference and the diameter of a circle; if the ratio equals pi the surface is a plane; if the ratio is less than pi the surface is a sphere. Thus they could discover where they live with the help of such measurements. This method, invented by Gauss (Karl Friedrich Gauss, b 1777 d 1855, German mathematician, was the first to discover a non-Euclidean geometry although he did not published his work) is suitable for a two-dimensional world. Riemann (Bernhard Riemann, b 1826 d 1866, German mathematician, developed both the elliptical geometry and the generalized theory of metric space in any number of dimension which Einstein used in his general theory of relativity) invented a method suitable for a three-dimensional world. There is no reason in principle why physicists could not use Riemann's method to discover the geometry of our world.

Riemann's method is based on physical measurements. Reichenbach carefully examines the epistemological implications of measuring geometrical entities. The empirical measurement of geometrical entities depends on physical objects or physical processes corresponding to geometrical concepts. The process of establishing such correlation is called a co-ordinative definition. Usually, a definition is a statement that gives the exact meaning of a concept; this kind of definition is called an explicit definition. There is another kind of definition, namely the co-ordinative definition; it is not a statement, but an ostensive definition. The co-ordinative definition of a concept is a correlation between a real object or a physical process and the concept itself. Some geometrical entities cannot be defined by an explicit definition but they require a co-ordinative definition. For example, the unit of length, ie the metre, is defined by a co-ordinative definition; the physical object corresponding to the metre is the standard rod in Paris (Museum of weights and measures in Paris houses the units of measure for International System of Units). Another example is the definition of straight line which is co-ordinated with a physical process, namely the path of a light ray.

What is the philosophical meaning of a co-ordinative definition? Reichenbach proposes the following problem, discussed in The philosophy of space and time. A measuring rod is moved from one point of space (say A) to another point (say B). When the measuring rod is in B, is its length altered? Many physical circumstances can alter the length, for example, if temperature in A differs from temperature in B. In this example, we can discover whether the temperature is the same by means of a metallic rod and a wooden rod which are of equal length when they are in A. Move the two rods to B: if their length becomes different then the temperature is also different, otherwise the temperature is the same. This method is suitable because temperature is a differential force, ie a force that produces different effects on different substances. But there are universal forces, which produce the same effect on all type of matter. The best known universal force is gravity: its effect is the same on all bodies and therefore all bodies fall with the same acceleration. Now suppose a universal force alters the length of the measuring rods when they are moved from A to B; in this instance, we do not observe any difference between the measuring rods and we cannot know whether the length is altered. Consequently, if a rod stays in A and the other is moved to B where a universal force alters its length, we cannot know their length is different. So we must acknowledge that there is not any way of knowing whether the length of two measuring rods, which are equal when they are in the same point of space, is the same when the two rods are in two different points of space. We can define the two rods equal in length if all differential forces are eliminated and disregard universal forces. But we can adopt a different definition, of course. Thus we must accept - Reichenbach says - that the geometrical form of a body is not an absolute fact, but depends on a co-ordinative definition. There is an astonish consequence of this fact. If a geometry G was proved to be the real geometry by a set of measurements, we could arbitrarily choose a different geometry G' and adopt a different set of co-ordinative definitions so that G' would become the real geometry. This is the principle of relativity of geometry, which Reichenbach examines, from a mathematical point of view, in Axiomatization of the theory of relativity and, from a philosophical point of view, in The philosophy of space and time. This principle states that all geometrical systems are equivalent; it falsifies alleged a priori character of Euclidean geometry and thus it falsifies the Kantian philosophy of space too.

At a first glance, the principle of relativity of geometry proves it is not possible to discover the real geometry of our world. This is true if we limit ourselves to metric relationships. Metric relationships are geometric properties of bodies depending on distances, angles, areas, and so forth; examples of metric relationships are "the ratio of circumference to diameter equals pi" and "the volume of A is greater than the volume of B." But we can study not only distances, angles, areas but also the order of space, the topology of space, i.e., the way in which the points of space are placed in relation to one another; an example of a topological relationship is "point A is between points B and C". A consequence of the principle of relativity of geometry is, for instance, that a plane and a sphere are equivalent with respect to metric. From a topological point of view, a sphere and a plane are not equivalent (in topology, two geometrical objects are equivalent if and only if there is a continuous transformation that assign to every point of the first object a unique point of the second and vice versa; there is not any transformation of this kind between a sphere and a plane). What is the philosophical significance of topology?

Reichenbach examines the following example (The philosophy of space and time). Measurements of space, performed by a two-dimensional being, suggest that he lives on a sphere, but, in spite of such measurements, he believes he lives on a plane. There is not any difficult, when he limits himself to metric relationships: he could adopt appropriate co-ordinative definitions and those measurements would become compatible with a plane. But the surface of a sphere is a finite surface and he might do a round-the-world tour, that is he could walk along a straight line from a point A and eventually he would arrive to the point A itself. Really this is impossible on a plane and he therefore should assert that this last point is not the point A, but a different point B which, in all other respects, is identical to A. Now there are two possibilities: (i) he changes his theory and acknowledges that he lives on a sphere or (ii) he maintains his position, but he needs to explain why point B is identical to A although A and B are different and distant points of space; he could accomplish his task only fabricating a fictitious theory of pre-established harmony: everything that occurs in A, immediately occurs in B.

Reichenbach says the second possibility entails an anomaly in the law of causality. If we assume normal causality, topology become an empirical theory and we can discover the geometry of the real world. This example is another falsification of Kantian theory of synthetic a priori. Kant believed both the Euclidean geometry and the law of causality were a priori. But if Euclidean geometry were an a priori truth, normal causality might be false; if normal causality were an a priori truth, Euclidean geometry might be false. We arbitrarily can choose the geometry or we arbitrarily can choose the causality; but we cannot choose both. Thus the most important implication of the philosophical analysis of topology is that the theory of space depends on normal causality.

b. Time

Normal causality is the main principle that underlies not only the theory of space but also the theory of time. The solution to the problem of an empirical theory of space was found when we acknowledged the priority of topological relationships over metric relationships. Also in the philosophy of time we must recognize the priority of topology. We must distinguish between two different concepts which are fundamental to the theory of time, namely the order of time and the direction of time. Time order is definable by means of causality (see The philosophy of space and time). The definition is: event A occurs before event B (and, of course, event B occurs after event A) if event A can produce a physical effect on event B. When can event A affect event B? The theory of relativity states that a finite time is required for an effect to go from event A to event B. The required time is finite because the velocity of light is a speed limit for all material particles, messages or effects, and because this velocity is finite. Suppose A and B are two events occurring in point PA and PB. Event A can affect event B if a light pulse emitted from PA when event A occurs reaches the point PB before event B occurs. If the light pulse reaches point PB when event B already occurred, event A cannot affect event B. If event A cannot affect event B and event B cannot affect event A, the order of the two events is indefinite and we could arbitrarily choose the event that occurs first or we might define the two event simultaneous; therefore simultaneity depends on a definition.

Reichenbach examines the consistency of this definition. Suppose an event A occurs before an event B and, from another point of view (reference frame), the event A occurs after the event B. In this circumstance there is a closed causal chain so that the event A produces an effect on the event B and the event B produces an effect on the event A. The definition is consistent only if we assume that there are not closed causal chains: the order of time depends on normal causality.

Reichenbach asserts that the relativity of simultaneity is independent of the relativity of motion. The relativity of simultaneity is due to the finite velocity of causal propagation. So it is a mistake - Reichenbach asserts in The philosophy of space and time and From Copernicus to Einstein - to derive the relativity of simultaneity from the relative motion of observers. Reichenbach also cautions against a possible misunderstanding of the multiplicity of observers in some expositions of the theory of relativity: observers are used only for convenience; the relativity of simultaneity has nothing to do with the relativity of observers. We must recognize - Reichenbach asserts - that the theory of an absolute simultaneity is a consistent theory although it is a wrong one. Absolute simultaneity and absolute time does not exist, but they are clever concepts.

Reichenbach also faces the problem of the direction of time. All mechanical processes are reversible: if f(t) is a solution of the equations of classical mechanics then f(-t) is also an admissible solution; also in the theory of relativity f(-t) is an admissible solution. Thus neither theory gives a consistent definition of the direction of time. In fact the direction of time is definable only by means of irreversible processes, that is, processes that are characterized by an increase of entropy. But the definition is not straightforward. The second law of thermodynamics, which states the principle of increase of entropy, is a statistical law, not a deterministic law. Really the elementary processes of statistical thermodynamics are reversible, because they are controlled by the laws of classical mechanics. In fact all macroscopic processes are theoretically reversible because statistical thermodynamics asserts that, in an isolated system, after an extremely large amount of time, the entropy will diminish to infinitesimally close to the initial value. In an isolated system, in an infinite time, there are as many downgrades as upgrades of the entropy. Thus if we observe two states A and B, and the entropy of B is greater than the entropy of A, we cannot assert that B is later than A. But if we consider not an isolated system, but many isolated systems over relatively short durations compared to the duration required for a return to the same value of entropy, then the probability that we observe a decrease of entropy is less than the probability we observe an increase of entropy. We can therefore use "many-system probabilities" to define a direction of time. Reichenbach asserts that it is possible to define an entropy for the whole universe, and statistical theory proves that the entropy of the universe first increases and then decreases; thus we can define a direction of time, but only for sections of time, not for the whole time. Reichenbach notes that this theory of time was stated in 19th century by Boltzmann (Ludwig Boltzmann, 1844-1906, Austrian physicist who formulated the statistical theory of entropy).

c. The Special Theory of Relativity

The special theory of relativity gives an unified theory of space and time in the absence of gravitational field. One example of the necessity of an unified theory of space and time is the length contraction, an effect predicted by the theory; this effect shows that the length of a moving rod depends on simultaneity. The special theory of relativity states that the length of a rod measured using a metre that is at rest with respect to the rod is different from the length measured using a metre which is moving with respect to the rod. In the first instance we measure the length of the rod by means of the well-known method used by classical mechanics. But we use a different method when the measuring rod is not at rest with respect to the metre. We measure the length of the moving rod by means of the distance between the two points occupied at a given time by the two ends of the moving rod, ie we mark the simultaneous positions of the two ends and we measure the distance between those positions; thus this method depend on the definition of simultaneity, which also depends on a definition. It must be acknowledged that the length of a moving rod is a matter of definition, but the length contraction is a genuine physical hypothesis confirmed by experiments. We must also recognize the priority of time over space: the ability to measure time is a requisite for the theory of space. Therefore only an unified theory of space and time is suitable. In spite of the necessity for an unified theory of space and time, Reichenbach states (in The philosophy of space and time) that space and time are different concepts which remain distinct in the theory of relativity. The real space is three-dimensional and the real time is one-dimensional: the four-dimensional space-time used in the theory of relativity is a mathematical artefact. Also the mathematical formulation of the special theory of relativity acknowledges the difference between space and time: the equation that defines the metric is dx^2 + dy^2 + dz^2 - dt^2 = ds^2 and the time coordinate is distinguishable from the space coordinates by the negative sign. How can we know the space is three-dimensional? and how can we recognize the difference between a real space and a mathematical space?

A physical effect is not immediately transmitted from one point to another distant point but it passes through every point between the source and the destination. This principle is known as the principle of local action and it denies the existence of action at a distance. In three-dimensional space the principle of local action is true while in a four-dimensional space it is false, so we can recognize that the real space is three-dimensional. We can also distinguish between a mathematical space and the real space because in a mathematical space the principle of local action is false. Reichenbach says that the truth of the principle of local action is an empirical fact, not an a priori truth: it could be false. But if this principle is true then there is only one n-dimensional space in which it is true; this n-dimensional space is the real space and n is the number of the dimensions of space. So we recognize that the real space is three-dimensional while the four-dimensional space used in the theory of relativity is a mathematical space, not a real one. We also recognize that the unified theory of space and time depends on normal causality.

Among the results of the special theory of relativity is time dilation: the period of a moving clock is greater than the period of a clock at rest and therefore the moving clock slows. Time dilation is an empirical hypothesis and Reichenbach says its physical meaning is that a clock does not measure the time coordinate but it measures the interval, ie the space-time distance between two events. In classical mechanics space is Euclidean and Pythagoras' theorem gives the distance ds between two points: ds^2 = dx^2 + dy^2 + dz^2; x,y,z are the space coordinates. The distance ds is measured by rod. Time is an independent coordinate and is measured by clock. The mathematical formulation of the special theory of relativity uses a four-dimensional space-time known as the Minkowski space (mathematician Hermann Minkowski, b 1864 d 1909, gave a mathematical formulation of Einstein's special theory of relativity), in which three coordinates are the space coordinates and one coordinate is the time coordinate. The distance ds between two points of Minkowski space is: ds^2 = dx^2 + dy^2 + dz^2 - dt^2; t is the time coordinate and ds (or ds^2) is the interval. A positive (negative) ds^2 is called a spacelike (timelike) interval. Suppose A and B are two events, interval ds^2 is negative and S is an inertial frame of reference moving with constant velocity v so that both events A and B occurs at the origin O of S, and suppose there is a clock in O; the time measured by the clock, called characteristic time, equals the interval ds. When the interval is positive, there is an inertial frame of reference S' with respect to which the two events are simultaneous; in this instance, the interval ds is realized by a measuring rod with the two ends coinciding with the events A and B and at rest with respect to S'. Time dilation shows an important difference between the special theory of relativity and classical mechanics; the special theory asserts that clocks and rods measure the interval while classical mechanics asserts they measure coordinates.

I briefly mention also Reichenbach's view on the velocity of light. He asserts that there is no way of measuring the velocity of light and proving it is constant, because the measurement of the velocity of light requires the definition of simultaneity which depends on the speed of light. Einstein - Reichenbach says - does not prove the speed of light is constant, but the special theory of relativity assumes it is constant, ie it is constant by definition.

d. The General Theory of Relativity

Newton's second law of motion states that the acceleration a of a body is proportional to the force F applied, so that F = m * a, where m is the inertial mass which represents the resistance to acceleration (force and acceleration are vectors and I use bold face as indicator of vector). Newton's law of gravitation asserts that every particle attracts every other particle with a force F proportional to the product of gravitational masses: F = G (m * m') / r^2; r is the distance between the two particles, m and m' are the gravitational mass which represent the response to the gravitational force. In classical mechanics, gravitational mass and inertial mass are equivalent; this principle of equivalence accounts for the law of free fall which states that the acceleration of every falling body is the same. The principle of equivalence is one of the principle of the general theory of relativity and its consequences are very important.

Suppose a physicist is into a closed elevator and he observers a body attached to a spring; he find the spring is stretched. There are two different although equivalent explanations.

  • First explanation. The body is attracted by the Earth and the gravitational force accounts for the stretching of the spring.
  • Second explanation. The elevator is in empty space so there is not any gravitational force, but the elevator is accelerated and the inertia of the body causes the stretching of the spring.

The two explanation are indistinguishable because of the equivalence between gravitational and inertial mass. This thought experiment shows that an accelerated frames of reference can simulate a gravitational field. Now suppose that in another thought experiment the body does not exert any force on the spring. Also in this instance there are two explanations.

  • First explanation. The elevator is at rest in empty space so there is not any force.
  • Second explanation. The elevator is free falling in a gravitational field so its acceleration equals gravitational acceleration; the body is falling but also the spring, the elevator and the physicist are falling with the same acceleration and therefore they are relatively at rest and there is not any force.

The consequence of this second thought experiment is that a gravitational field can be eliminated by means of an accelerated frame of reference. The theory of general relativity states that free falling accelerated frames of reference are inertial systems. Reichenbach says that this hypothesis is not a consequence of the principle of equivalence; it is a genuine physical hypothesis which goes beyond experience. There is an important consequence of this hypothesis. The special theory of relativity is true in inertial frames of reference, so in every inertial system the motion of a light ray is represented by a straight line. But the general theory of relativity states that a free falling frame of reference is an inertial system, so the light moves in a straight line with respect to this frame of reference; with respect to a frame of reference which is at rest on Earth (in this system there is a gravitational field) the light rays are curved. The consequence is that light is curved by gravity. Another consequence of the hypothesis that a free falling frame of reference is an inertial system is the time dilation in the presence of a gravitational field.

The general theory of relativity gives an unified theory of space, time and gravitation; it requires a non-Euclidean four-dimensional geometry, known as Riemannian geometry. Reichenbach explains the main properties of this kind of geometry and the main differences between Euclidean geometry and Riemannian geometry. In Euclidean geometry the distance between two points is given by a simple function of coordinates; also in Minkowski four-dimensional space-time the interval is calculable by means of coordinates. In Euclidean geometry the coordinates have both a metric and topological significance; this is true also in the special theory of relativity. In Riemannian geometry the four coordinates perform a topological function, not a metric one. This means that we cannot calculate the distance between two points by means of coordinates. The metric functions is performed by the metric tensor g; it is a mathematical entity represented by 16 components. The geometry of four-dimensional space-time depends on the metric tensor g; for example, if the components of g are

1 0 0 0
0 1 0 0
0 0 1 0
0 0 0 1

then the geometry is a Minkowski geometry (ie the geometry of the special theory). Thus the tensor g expresses the geometry. But g is determined by the gravitational field, because the metric tensor also expresses the acceleration of the frame of reference and the effects of an acceleration are equivalent to the effects of a gravitational field. The metric tensor g expresses both the physical geometry and the gravitational field. The consequence is astonishingly: the geometry of the universe is produced by gravitational fields. Therefore the general theory of relativity does not reduce gravitation to geometry; on the contrary, geometry is based on gravitation. The properties of space and time are empirical properties caused by gravitational fields.

e. The Reality of Space and Time

Reichenbach asserts (in The philosophy of space and time) that the reality of space and time is an unquestionable result of the epistemological analysis of the theory of relativity. With respect to the problem of reality, space and time are not different from the other physical concepts. But the reality of space and time does not imply the concept of an absolute space and time. Space and time are relational concepts and we can study their properties because of the existence of physical objects, for example, clocks, that realize relationships between space-time entities. Reichenbach also emphasizes the causal theory of space and time: causality is the basis of both philosophical and physical theory of space and time.

3. Quantum Mechanics

a. Interpretation of Quantum Physics: Part I

The main thesis of Reichenbach's work on quantum mechanics (Philosophic foundations of quantum mechanics) is that there is not any exhaustive interpretation of quantum mechanics which is free from causal anomalies. A causal anomaly is a violation of the principle of local action; this principle states that the action at a distance does not exist. We have found the principle of local action and causal anomalies in Reichenbach's philosophy of space and time.

Two main interpretations of quantum mechanics are involved with the wave-particle duality. Wave interpretation states that atomic entities are waves or things that resemble waves; it grew out of the discovery of the wave-like nature of light and it is supported by many experiments, for example the two-slit experiment. In this experiment a beam of electrons is direct towards a screen with two slits and an interference pattern is produced behind the screen, showing that electrons act as waves. The corpuscolar interpretation regards atomic entities as particles; it is supported by a long standing tradition and by the fact that atomic entities show corpuscular properties, for example, mass and momentum. Both wave and corpuscular interpretation entail causal anomalies. For example corpuscular interpretation cannot fully explain the two-slit experiment. An electron acting as a particle goes through only one slit and its behaviour is independent of the existence of another slit in a different point of space. In fact, if one slit is open and the other is close, the interference pattern is not produced: electrons behave as if they were informed whether the other slit is open. But wave interpretation cannot fully explain a slightly different experiment. An electron can be localized by a detector put near a slit and the electron is detected as particle. However for every event in quantum realm there is an interpretation by means of particles or waves but there is not a unique interpretation for all events. Both corpuscular and wave interpretation are not verifiable; they are not matter of experience but they are matter of definition.

There are two models that are free of causal anomalies; they are restricted interpretations, ie they exclude the admissibility of certain statements. One is Bohr-Heisenberg interpretation (Niels Bohr, b 1885 d 1962, Danish physicist winner of Nobel prize in 1922, gave the first account of the quantum theory of atoms; Werner Karl Heisenberg, b 1901 d 1976, German physicist winner of Nobel prize in 1932, formulated matrix mechanics and proved the principle of indeterminacy according to which there is no way of measuring both position and momentum of atomic particles). This interpretation states that speaking about values of not measured physical quantities is meaningless. In the two-slit experiment, when the two slits are open and electrons interfere with themselves, the position of electrons cannot be measured; thus a statement about the position of electrons is meaningless and the particle interpretation is forbidden. There are two main faults - Reichenbach says - in Bohr-Heisenbergh interpretation: (i) Heisenberg indeterminacy principle becomes a meta-statement on the semantics of the language of physics and (ii) it implies the presence of meaningless statements in physics.

The other interpretation depends on three-valued logic, ie a formal system that acknowledges three truth values: true, false and indeterminate.

b. Mathematical Formulation of Quantum Mechanics

Reichenbach carefully examines and explains the mathematical formulation of quantum mechanics. It is based on the notion of quantum operator; a quantum operator is a mathematical entity corresponding to a given classical quantity. For example, the quantum operator energy correspond to the energy in classical physics. A quantum operator can only assume discrete values while the corresponding classical quantity assumes continuous values. Note that an operator is not a function; it indicates a set of operation to be performed on a function.

Let U be a classical quantity; U depends on position Q and momentum P, that is U=F[Q,P] (position and momentum are vectors and I use bold face as indicator of vector; I use square brackets to show that a function depends on given quantities). The quantum operator corresponding to U is called Uop and is defined by the following statements.

  1. For every function F[Q], substitute 'multiply by F[Q]' to 'F[Q]'.
  2. Substitute 'multiply the first partial derivative with respect to Q by C' to 'P', where C=h/(2*pi*i), h is the Planck constant, pi equals 3.14..., i is the square root of -1.
  3. Substitute 'multiply the second partial derivative with respect to Q by C^2' to 'P', where C=h/(2*pi*i), h is the Planck constant, pi equals 3.14..., i is the square root of -1.

c. Examples of Quantum Operators

Let T be the kinetic energy; in classical mechanics, the kinetic energy is given by the ratio of the square of momentum P to twice the mass m, that is T=P^2 / 2m. Quantum operator Top is given by Top=C^2 * (1/2m) * D" (I use symbol D' to indicate the first partial derivative with respect to position and D" to indicate the second partial derivative with respect to position).

Let H be the mechanical energy, ie the sum of the kinetic energy T and the potential energy V: H=T+V[Q]; therefore Hop=Top+Vop=C^2 * (1/2m) * D" + V[Q]. If F is a given function, the result (indicated by Hop F) of performing the operations described by operator Hop on function F is C^2 * (1/2m) * D" F + V * F.

d. Heisenberg Indeterminacy Principle

Let Pop and Qop the quantum operator corresponding to momentum and position. It is easy to verify that for every function F

(H) Pop Qop F - Qop Pop F = C * F

and the equation H is a mathematical formulation of Heisenberg indeterminacy principle. The proof of equation H is straightforward.

Pop Qop F - Qop Pop F =
Pop (Q * F) - Qop (C * D' F) =
C * (D' (Q * F) - Q * (D' F) =
C * (D' Q * F + Q * D' F - Q * D' F) =
C * F

Reichenbach explains the physical meaning of equation H. Equation H proves that the eigenvalues of position and momentum are different. Now suppose a physicist measures both position and momentum of a particle; let Fp be the eigenfunction corresponding to the measured momentum and Fq be the eigenfunction corresponding to the measured position. From the measurement of position: PSI = Fp; from the measurement of momentum: PSI = Fq. Therefore Fp = Fq and the eigenvalues are the same; but the eigenvalues are different. So position and momentum of a particle cannot be simultaneously measured. Reichenbach asserts that Heisenberg indeterminacy principle is not due to the alleged interference an observer exerts on particles (the explanation of indeterminacy principle in terms of an interference is due to Heisenberg). This principle is an objective law of nature, and it can be stated without reference to observers.

e. The Interpretation of Quantum Physics: Part II

After the mathematical formulation of quantum mechanics, Reichenbach states the basic assumption of the different interpretation of quantum mechanics. Corpuscolar interpretation relies on the following definition. If a measurement of U equals Um, then Um is the values of U not only at the time of measurement but also immediately before and immediately after. If a physicist measures the position of an electron and immediately after its momentum, than he know both position and momentum of the electron. In this interpretation atomic particles have both momentum and position, so they are real particles; a physicist can also measure both momentum and position. The knowledge of both position and momentum is unusable because of the difference between the eigenfunctions: if PSI equals the eigenfunction "position" the knowledge of momentum is totally unused while if PSI equals the eigenfunction "momentum" the knowledge of position is totally unused.

Wave interpretation states that the value of a measured quantity exists after the measurement but before the measurement the quantity assumes simultaneously all possible values. The effect of the measurement is the collapse of wave function.

Bohr-Heisenberg interpretation asserts that the value of a physical quantity exists only after the measurement; a statement about this value before the measurement is therefore meaningless.

The interpretation based on three-valued logic states that a statement about a not measured physical quantity can be neither true nor false: it can be indeterminate. The following tables show the properties of logical connectives in the three-valued logic suggested by Reichenbach (symbols used in these tables differ from symbols used by Reichenbach).

negation: cyclic (-) diametrical (?) complete (^))

A -A ?A ^A

or (v) and (&)
implication: standard (>) alternative (#) quasi (*)
equivalence: standard (=) alternative ()

A B (AvB) (A&B) (A>B) (A#B) (A*B) (A=B) (AB)

Suppose P is the statement "the momentum of the particle is p" and Q is the statement "the position of the particle is q"; then Heisenberg indeterminacy principle is expressed by the following statement: (Pv-P) # --Q. The following table is the truth-table of this sentence.

P Q -P Pv-P -Q --Q (Pv-P) # --Q

The truth of (Pv-P) # --Q implies that the situations described in 1st, 3rd, 7th and 9th row of the truth-table are forbidden. Reichenbach explains how the three-valued interpretation hides causal anomalies. Look at the two-slit experiment. Suppose the two slits are open and the interference pattern is produced. Let P(A) be the probability that an electron goes through the first slit; let P(B) be the probability that an electron goes through the second slit; let P(A,C) be the probability that an electron gone through the first slit hits the screen in point C; let P(B,C) be the probability that an electron gone through the second slit hits the screen in point C; let P(C) the probability that an electron hits the screen in point C. Corpuscular interpretation suggests that

(E2) P(C)=P(A)*P(A,C)+P(B)*P(B,C)

In fact P(C) is not given by equation E2: this is the origin of causal anomalies. Equation E2 can be expressed by the following statement: (AvB)#C, where A is "the electron goes through the first slit", B is "the electron goes through the second slit" and C is E2. We know that (i) if an electron goes through the first slit then it does not go through the second slit and vice versa, ie A # -B and B # -A; (ii) if an electron does not go through a slit then it goes through the other slit, ie -A # B and -B # A. In classical logic, (i) and (ii) imply AvB, ie [(A # -B)&(B # -A)&(-A # B)&(-B # A)] # AvB is true (look at the following table).

A B [((A # -B) & (B # -A)) & ((-A # B) & (-B # A))] # AvB

The truth-table is restricted to one combination of truth-values because in the other combinations the consequence AvB is true and the statement Z # (AvB) is true for all Z. In corpuscular interpretation of two-slit experiment the statement (A # -B)&(B # -A)&(-A # B)&(-B # A) is true; in classical logic the statement [(A # -B)&(B# -A)&(-A # B)&(-B # A)] # AvB is true and thus also AvB is true; therefore E2 is true. But E2 does not give the correct formula for the probability and so there is a causal anomaly. In three-valued logic, (i) and (ii) do not imply AvB; this fact is proved by means of the following table.

A B [((A # -B) & (B # -A)) & ((-A # B) & (-B # A))] # AvB

Thus we cannot assert E2 and there is not any causal anomaly.

4. Reichenbach's Epistemology

a. The Structure of Science and the Verifiability Principle

A scientific theory is a formal system which requires a physical interpretation by means of co-ordinative definitions. Reichenbach's philosophical research on the theory of relativity and quantum mechanics implicitly depends on this view. For example, the distinction between mathematical geometry and physical geometry entails the distinction between a purely formal system and a system interpreted by means of definitions. Co-ordinative definitions are true by convention and cannot be verified, but they are not meaningless; in fact scientific theories require them to acquire an empirical significance. The acknowledgement of the existence of meaningful and not verifiable sentences is very important for a right interpretation of the epistemology of logical positivism. The verifiability principle is often regarded as the most important principle of logical positivism; it states that the meaning of a sentence is its method of verification and a sentence which cannot be verified is meaningless. According to this principle, co-ordinative definitions might be meaningless; on the contrary, in Reichenbach opinion, they are not only meaningful but also required by scientific theories. Note that Reichenbach explicit agrees with verifiability principle. In 'The philosophical significance of the theory of relativity' (1949) he says that the meaning of a sentence is reducible to its method of verification; he also says that a physicist can fully understand the Michelson's experiment only if he adopts the verifiability theory of meaning. In the same essay, Reichenbach says that the logic foundation of the theory of relativity is the discovery that many problems are not verifiable; these problems can be solved by means of co-ordinative definitions. Thus co-ordinative definitions are meaningful and not verifiable. So we must acknowledge that Reichenbach agrees with the verifiability principle and, at the same time, asserts that in scientific theories there are meaningful sentences, namely co-ordinative definitions, that are not verifiable. Why these sentences are not meaningless? Because they belong to scientific theories that are verifiable. For example, Reichenbach states that (i) the Euclidean geometry is not verifiable, (ii) the co-ordinative definitions of geometrical entities are not verifiable but (iii) the Euclidean geometry plus the co-ordinative definitions of geometrical entities is verifiable. The theory must be verifiable, the individual statements belonging to the theory can be not verifiable.

b. Conventionalism vs. Empiricism

In Reichenbach opinion, among the purposes of the philosophy of science is the search for a distinction between empirical and conventional sentences. The separation of empirical from conventional sentences is not only possible but also necessary for a full understanding of scientific theories. Philosophical research on modern science clearly shows that conventional elements are present in scientific knowledge. The description of our world is not uniquely determined by observations, but there is a plurality of equivalent descriptions; for example, we can use different geometry for describing the same space. But conventionalism is in error. For example, conventionalism states that we can always adopt the Euclidean geometry by means of appropriate definitions. But if we adopt a set of definitions so that the geometry on the Earth is Euclidean, it is possible that in another point of the universe the same set of definitions entails a non-Euclidean geometry; so we can discover an objective difference between different points of space. Note that Reichenbach does not state that scientific knowledge can be proved by means of experience. On the contrary, he asserts that scientific theories are based on physical hypotheses which are not a logical consequence of experiments, for example, the general theory of relativity is based on Einstein's hypothesis that free falling frames of reference are inertial systems; we cannot prove this hypothesis, but we can verify its consequences. Scientific theories cannot be proved, but we can test their forecasts.

c. Causality

Causality plays a central role in Reichenbach's philosophy of science. Reichenbach uses the theory of causality as a key to provide access to modern physics and understanding of the philosophical significance of both the theory of relativity and quantum mechanics. According to Reichenbach, the causal theory of space and time is the basis for both the theory of relativity and the philosophy of space and time. In the theory of relativity it is always possible to choose a set of co-ordinative definitions satisfying normal causality. Therefore different geometrical systems are not equivalent and they can be divided into two groups, one group satisfying normal causality while the other entails causal anomalies. Only geometrical systems belonging to the first group are admissible. It is the experience that decides whether a given geometry belongs to the first group; thus conventionalism's view on geometry is wrong. In quantum mechanics there is not any set of co-ordinative definitions which is free from causal anomalies and satisfies classical logic. In fact, a three-valued logic is required to give an interpretation satisfying normal causality.

d. Science and Philosophy

First of all, we must acknowledge his scientific seriousness and physical-mathematical skill. His deep knowledge of modern physics is unquestionable. Reichenbach's positive attitude towards scientific knowledge was influenced not only by his teachers but also by his own philosophical views. In his opinion, modern physics is concerned with problems that, until the late 19th century, were regarded as philosophical problems, for example, the nature of space and time, the source of gravitation, the real extent of causality. In 17th and 18th century - Reichenbach says - philosophers were usually interested in science and many of them were also mathematicians and physicists, for example, Descartes and Leibniz; Kant's epistemology was based on scientific knowledge. But since 18th science became extraneous to philosophy. Nowadays - Reichenbach wrote in 1928 - there is an almost complete separation of philosophy from physical sciences; philosophical researches into epistemology are fruitless, because of this separation. On the other hand, scientists cannot explicitly help the progress of epistemology: they are too much involved in technical researches. There is only one way to overcome this difficulty: philosophers, who are not concerned with technical subjects but deal with genuine philosophical problems, must dedicate themselves to the philosophical analysis of modern physics, so they can clearly express the implicit philosophical content of scientific theories. In fact, modern physics is rich in philosophical consequences: there is more philosophy in Einstein's work than in many philosophical systems.

5. References and Further Reading

Reichenbach's Main Works, arranged in Chronological Order..

  • 1916 Der Begriff der Wahrscheinlichkeit fur die mathematische Darstellung der Wirklichkeit, dissertation, Erlangen, 1915
  • 1920 Relativitatstheorie und Erkenntnis apriori (English translation The theory of relativity and a priori knowledge, Berkeley : University of California Press, 1965)
  • 1921 'Bericht uber eine Axiomatik der Einsteinschen Raum-Zeit-Lehre' in Phys. Zeitschr., 22
  • 1922 'Der gegenwartige Stand der Relativitatsdiskussion' in Logos, X (English translation 'The present state of the discussion on relativity' in Modern philosophy of science : selected essays by Hans Reichenbach, London : Routledge & Kegan Paul ; New York : Humanities press, 1959)
  • 1924 Axiomatik der relativistischen Raum-Zeit-Lehre (English translation Axiomatization of the theory of relativity, Berkeley : University of California Press, 1969)
  • 1924 'Die Bewegungslehre bei Newton, Leibniz und Huyghens' in Kantstudien, 29 (English translation 'The theory of motion according to Newton, Leibniz, and Huyghens' in Modern philosophy of science : selected essays by Hans Reichenbach, London : Routledge & Kegan Paul ; New York : Humanities press, 1959)
  • 1925 'Die Kausal-strukture der Welt und der Unterschied von Vergangenheit und Zukunft' in Sitzungsber d. Bayer. Akad. d. Wiss., math-naturwiss.
  • 1927 Von Kopernikus bis Einstein. Der Wandel unseres Weltbildes (English translation From Copernicus to Einstein, New York : Alliance book corp., 1942)
  • 1928 Philosophie der Raum-Zeit-Lehre (English translation The philosophy of space and time, New York : Dover Publications, 1958)
  • 1929 'Stetige Wahrscheinlichkeits folgen' in Zeitschr. f. Physik, 53
  • 1929 'Ziele und Wege der physikalische Erkenntnis' in Handbuch der Physik ed. by Hans Geiger and Karl Scheel, Bd IV, Berlin : Julius Springer
  • 1930 Atom und kosmos. Das physikalische Weltbild der Gegenwart (English translation Atom and cosmos; the world of modern physics, London : G. Allen & Unwin, ltd., 1932)
  • 1931 Ziele und Wege der heutigen Naturphilosophie (English translation 'Aims and methods of modern philosophy of nature' in Modern philosophy of science : selected essays, Westport : Greenwood Press, 1959)
  • 1933 'Kant und die Naturwissenschaft', Die Naturwissenschaften, 33-34
  • 1935 Wahrscheinlichkeitslehre : eine Untersuchung uber die logischen und mathematischen Grundlagen der Wahrscheinlichkeitsrechnung (English translation The theory of probability, an inquiry into the logical and mathematical foundations of the calculus of probability, Berkeley : University of California Press, 1948)
  • 1938 Experience and prediction: an analysis of the foundations and the structure of knowledge, Chicago : University of Chicago Press
  • 1944 Philosophic foundations of quantum mechanics, Berkeley and Los Angeles : University of California press
  • 1947 Elements of symbolic logic, New York, Macmillan Co.
  • 1948 Philosophy and physics, 'Faculty research lectures, 1946', Berkeley, Univ. of California Press
  • 1949 'The philosophical significance of the theory of relativity' in Albert Einstein: philosopher-scientist, edit by P. A. Schillp, Evanston : The Library of Living Philosophers
  • 1951 The rise of scientific philosophy, Berkeley : University of California Press
  • 1953 'Les fondaments logiques de la mechanique des quanta' in Annales de l'Istitut Henri Poincare', Tome XIII Fasc II
  • 1954 Nomological statements and admissible operations, Amsterdam : Nort Holland Publishing Company
  • 1956 The direction of time, Berkeley : University of California Press

Collected works (in German).

  • Gesammelte Werke : in 9 Banden ; herausgegeben von Andreas Kamlah und Maria Reichenbach, Wiesbaden : Vieweg
  • 1977 Bd. 1: Der Aufstieg der wissenschaftlichen Philosophie
  • 1977 Bd. 2: Philosophie der Raum-Zeit-Lehre
  • 1979 Bd. 3: Die philosophische Bedeutung der Relativitatstheorie
  • 1983 Bd. 4: Erfahrung und Prognose : eine Analyse der Grundlagen und der Struktur der Erkenntnis
  • 1989 Bd. 5: Philosophische Grundlagen der Quantenmechanik und Wahrscheinlichkeit
  • 1994 Bd. 7: Wahrscheinlichkeitslehre : eine Untersuchung uber die logischen und mathematischen Grundlagen der Wahrscheinlichkeitsrechnung

Other sources.

  • 1959 Modern philosophy of science : selected essays by Hans Reichenbach, London : Routledge & Kegan Paul ; New York : Humanities press
  • 1959 Modern philosophy of science : selected essays by Hans Reichenbach, Westport, Conn. : Greenwood Press
  • 1978 Selected writings, 1909-1953 : with a selection of biographical and autobiographical sketches, 'Vienna circle collection', Dordrecht ; Boston : D. Reidel Pub.
  • 1979 Hans Reichenbach, logical empiricist, 'Synthese library', Dordrecht ; Boston : D. Reidel Pub.
  • 1991 Erkenntnis orientated : a centennial volume for Rudolf Carnap and Hans Reichenbach, Dordrecht ; Boston : Kluwer Academic Publishers
  • 1991 Logic, language, and the structure of scientific theories : proceedings of the Carnap-Reichenbach centennial, University of Konstanz, 21-24 May 1991, Pittsburgh : University of Pittsburgh Press ; [Konstanz] : Universitasverlag Konstanz
  • Erkenntnis was published between 1930 and 1940. Its name was Erkenntnis — im Auftrage der Gesellschaft fur Empirische Philosophie, Berlin und des Vereins Ernst Mach in Wien, hrsg. v. R. Carnap und H. Reichenbach (Knowledge — in agreement with Society for empirical philosophy, Berlin and Ernst Mach Association (the Vienna Circle) at Vienna, edited by R. Carnap and H. Reichenbach). In 1939-40 its name changed into The Journal of Unified Science (Erkenntnis), edited by O. Neurath, R. Carnap, Charles Morris, published by University of Chicago Press.

Author Information

Mauro Murzi

Wang Bi (226—249 C.E.)

Wang Bi (Wang Pi), styled Fusi, is regarded as one of the most important interpreters of the classical Chinese texts known as the Daodejing (Tao Te Ching) and the Yijing (I Ching). He lived and worked during the period after the collapse of the Han dynasty in 220 C.E., an era in which elite interest began to shift away from Confucianism toward Daoism. As a self-identified Confucian, Wang Bi wanted to create an understanding of Daoism that was consistent with Confucianism but which did not fall into what he considered to be the errors of then-popular Daoist sectarian groups.  He understood his main task to be the restoration of order and a sense of direction to Chinese society after the turbulent final years of the Han, and offered the ideal of establishing the “true way” (zhendao) as the solution.  Although he died at the age of twenty-four, his interpretations of Daoism became influential for several reasons.  The edition of the Daodejing that he used in his commentary on that work has been the basis for almost every translation into a Western language for nearly two centuries.  Moreover, his interpretations of Daoist material did not undermine Confucianism, making them palatable to later Confucian thinkers.  Finally, Wang Bi’s work provided a way of talking about indigenous Chinese beliefs that made them seem compatible with the introduction of Indian Buddhist texts and ideas in the decades to follow.

Table of Contents

  1. The Context of Wang Bi’s Work
  2. Wang Bi’s Commentaries
    1. On the Analects
    2. On the Yijing
    3. On the Daodejing
  3. Central Ideas in Wang Bi’s Writings
    1. On Language
    2. On Non-Being
    3. On “The One”
    4. On Wuwei
    5. On Ziran
  4. Wang Bi’s Influence on Chinese Philosophy
  5. References and Further Reading

1. The Context of Wang Bi’s Work

Wang Bi lived and worked during the period after the collapse of the Han dynasty in 220 C.E., an era in which elite interest began to shift toward Daoism. A brief explanation of this transformation of intellectual interests in early medieval China is necessary in order to understand Wang Bi’s thought in its original context.

Beginning with the reign of Emperor Wu (c. 140-187 B.C.E.), the Han state embraced Confucianism as its official ideology. Training in the Confucian classics became mandatory for all officials, and there was an active program of suppression of alternative thought, including the persecution of Prince Liu An of Huainan, a prominent Daoist supporter. Nevertheless, Daoism did not disappear. By the first century C.E., Daoist texts began to reappear in political discussion, and during the following century, sectarian Daoist movements such as the tianshi (Celestial Masters) became active. Although Confucian scholars were still needed by the rulers of post-Han states such as the Wei because of their knowledge and experience in state rituals and administrative matters, by Wang Bi’s time Daoism was “in the air” and exercising a powerful influence on the thinking of commoner and aristocrat alike.

Accordingly, the interests of some members of the educated elite turned toward Daoism. They labored to create a renaissance in Daoist thought, but one that directly avoided following the religious beliefs and practices of the Celestial Masters and the various permutations of Daoism that had rapidly developed. These thinkers are generally gathered loosely under the title of xuanxue (Dark Learning, Mysterious Learning or Profound Learning), sometimes called Neo-Daoism. The term xuanxue was derived from a line in the first chapter of the Daodejing, according to which the dao (Way) is xuan zhi you xuan (darker than dark). Among the principal xuanxue figures were Zhong Hui (225-264 C.E.), Xiang Xiu (c. 223-300 C.E.), Guo Xiang (d. 312 C.E.), and Wang Bi.

A Confucian rather than a sectarian Daoist, Wang Bi wanted to create an understanding of Daoism that was consistent with Confucianism but which did not fall into what he considered to be the errors of the Celestial Masters and their popular religious practices. He understood his main task to be the restoration of order and a sense of direction to Chinese society after the turbulent final years of the Han. He offered the ideal of establishing the “true way” (zhendao) as the solution. Undoubtedly, his ultimate goal was to examine the mysterious knowledge of creation and translate it into a viable political and social program. Due to his untimely death, however, he had very little impact on the politics of his day. Nevertheless, through his commentarial work and the way in which his ideas were regarded as congenial to early Chinese Buddhism, his philosophical influence was profound.

2. Wang Bi’s Commentaries

Wang Bi’s best known commentaries are those on the Daodejing and Yijing. What is often overlooked is that he also wrote a commentary on the Confucian Analects (Lunyu Shiyi), some fragments of which still survive. His writings have been collected and annotated in two volumes entitled Wang Bi ji jiaoshi (Critical Edition of Wang Bi’s Collected Works). The bibliography below lists this work and other English translations of his major commentaries (see References and Further Reading).

a. On the Analects

What we know about the Analects commentary is that it was written as a criticism of the texts that Wang’s mentor He Yan (Ho Yen, d. 249 B.C.E.) considered to be most important. Wang’s approach, as far as we can tell from what remains of the commentary, was to focus on those passages that stress the limited capacity of language, especially with respect to the inability to define in language the nature of the sage. His selection of passages and remarks sets up a substantial rapprochement between Confucianism and his version of Daoism by basically providing him with a kind of hermeneutical license. His commentaries are in the zhangju (“chapter and verse”) format, in which a great deal of emphasis is placed on individual words and images in the “verses” and the meaning that lies behind them, carefully avoiding any sort of approach that regards philosophical concepts as referential.

b. On the Yijing

Wang’s commentary on the Yijing, a traditional Chinese divinatory text of uncertain antiquity consisting of hexagrams and their interpretations, cross-annotates it with the Daodejing. In this way, he transforms the interpretive tradition concerned with the Yijing by setting aside what he regards as an over-reliance on mathematical and symbolic readings of the text (typical of Han scholars) and exposing what he takes to be its xuanxue.For example, while Han thinkers such as Ma Rong (79-106 C.E.) tried to make textual images referential, Wang avoided this consistently. Alan Chan specifically mentions Ma’s explanation of the Yi jing comment, “the number of the great expansion is fifty, but use is made only of forty-nine.” Ma claims that “fifty” refers to the polestar, the two forms of yin and yang, the sun and moon, the four seasons, the five elements (wuxing), the twelve months, and the twenty-four calendar periods. In Ma’s interpretation, because the polestar does not move, it is not used, and thus the number is forty-nine, not fifty. In contrast to this approach, Wang looks behind the language for underlying principles or xuanxue meanings.

Wang’s commentary on the hexagrams draws heavily from passages in the Daodejing and Zhuangzi . He uses major Daoist ideas to interpret the Yijing, culminating in his theory that change and dao are unified and his position that Laozi’s ideas are already contained in the Yijing. He appropriates the notions of being (you) and nothingness (wu) from the Daodejing and uses them in his interpretation of divination.

c. On the Daodejing

Many of Wang’s most basic ideas concerning the Daodejing are discussed below. But with respect to his commentary on this work, he is probably as well known for the text that was transmitted with the commentary as he is famed for the commentary itself. This text became the basis, first for Chinese scholarship on the Daodejing, and later for translations of the text into Western languages. In his A Chinese Reading of the Daodejing: Wang Bi's Commentary on the Laozi with Critical Text and Translation, the best-known Western scholar of Wang Bi, Rudolf Wagner, provides a careful study of Wang’s work on the text.

The recent translation of the Daodejing by Roger Ames and David Hall is based on a conflation of the two Mawangdui (MWD) versions of the text, supplemented by that of Wang Bi. Mawangdui is the name of a site near Changsha in Hunan province in which some early Han tombs containing texts were discovered in 1972. These discoveries include two incomplete editions of the Daodejing on silk scrolls, now simply called “A”and “B.” Ames and Hall believe that Wang was actually working from a textual source that was closer to their own conflated version of the MWD materials than the received text that he had put in his own commentary (Ames and Hall, 76). In contrast, another recent translator of the Daodejing, P.J. Ivanhoe, believes that although the MWD versions offer help with how one might translate certain passages, there is nothing in them that fundamentally conflicts with or alters our understanding of the core philosophical notions of the Wang Bi text.

Wang’s version of the Daodejing contains eighty-one chapters that are divided into two books, but the actual division of the text into two books predates the Wang Bi edition. Later versions of the text built upon that of Wang and added book and chapter titles. In Wang’s edition, Book One consists of chapters 1 through 37, and later it came to be called the dao half of the text. Book Two consists of chapters 38 to 81 and is known as the de half. One of the principal differences between the MWD versions and that of Wang Bi is that the order of the chapters is reversed, with 38-81 in the Wang Bi coming before chapters 1-37 in the MWD versions. Robert Henricks has published a translation of these texts with extensive notes and comparisons with the Wang Bi under the title Lao-Tzu: Te-tao Ching.

3. Central Ideas in Wang Bi’s Writings

a. On Language

A substantial part of Wang’s interpretive philosophy is rooted in his view of language. His view of language is consistent with that of the Daodejing and the Zhuangzi. Both works teach that words are inadequate for the expression of truth. As Daodejing 1 says, “The way that can be spoken of is not the constant way. The name that can be named is not the true name.” For Wang, this means that the dao lies beyond language He goes further, however, holding that words must always be distinguished from their underlying meaning. Indeed, Wang claims that taking words referentially is an obstacle to xuanxue -- that words must be forgotten in order to penetrate into the world of meaning. He finds support for this view in classical Daoist texts. Specifically, he makes use of the Zhuangzi’s teaching about “forgetfulness” (chs. 4, 12, 24). This view of language gives Wang the freedom to uncover what he believes to be the profound meaning that lies behind the words of the classical texts of Daoism, which in turn makes it easier for him to tie them to the Yijing and even to the Confucius of the Analects. It also allows him to offer a construction of Daoist ideas that can be distinguished sharply from that of the sectarian Daoism of his day.

b. On Non-Being

Wang’s commentary on the Daodejing centers around his interpretation of the concept of “nothing” (wu) or “non-being” as that out of which the ten thousand things (e.g., all phenomena) arise. He believes that “nothing” is pointed to in the text by means of its fundamental analogies: valley, canyon, bowl, door, window, pitcher, and hub of a wheel. There can be no doubt that Wang regards “nothing” as the dao. When he explains the first sentence of Daodejing 6 (“The spirit of the valley never dies; it is called the obscure female”), he says, “The spirit of the valley is the Non-Being found in the center of a valley. The Non-Being has neither form, nor shadow; it conforms completely to what surrounds it….Its form is invisible: it is the Supreme Being.”

c. On "The One"

In articulating his understanding of the dao, Wang appeals directly to the Daodejing’s comments on cosmogony, according to which the dao gives birth to One, One gives birth to two, two to three, and three to the ten thousand things. Yet Wang does not believe that the One is a being. On the contrary, it is the mysterious center of things, like the hub of a wheel. The dao is Non-Being. Dao is not an agent. It does not have a will. To say that it lies at the “beginning” is not to make a temporal statement, but a metaphysical one. On Daodejing 25, Wang writes, “It is spoken of as ‘Dao’ insofar as there is thus something [for things] to come from.” Interpreting the fifty-first chapter, he writes, “The Dao—this is where things come from.” Wang makes his views clearer when he offers a commentary on the word “One.” Han thinkers took the One referentially and identified it with the North Star. But Wang takes a radically different approach. For him, the One is not used referentially in terms of some external thing, nor is it a number. It is that on which numbers depend.

The idea that the One underlies and unites all phenomena is also vigorously stressed in Wang’s commentary on the Yijing. In this work, Wang makes it clear just how it is that dao as Non-Being is related to the world of Being. The Yijing consists of hexagrams made up of six broken lines (representing the yin cosmic force) and unbroken lines (representing the yang cosmic force). Since ancient times, the text has been used as a tool for divination. In Wang’s day, the typical interpretation of a hexagram associated it with a specific external event, but Wang uses his theory of language to put forward the view that the hexagram’s meaning lies in identifying the general principle (li) behind all particular objects. Wang thinks that the principle is discoverable in one of the six lines of a hexagram, so that the other five become secondary. These principles constitute the fiber of the One.

d. On Wuwei

Wang Bi’s views on the sage reveal his understanding of wuwei (effortless action). He believes that the sage rises above all distinctions and contradictions. According to Wang, although the sage remains in the midst of human affairs, he accomplishes things by taking no unnatural action. Thus, the sage’s conduct is an example of wuwei. Wang is clear that this does not mean that the sage “folds his arms and sits in silence in the midst of some mountain forest.” It means that the sage acts naturally. To such a sage, all life transformations are the same and one must not impose value judgments on them. In making decisions, the sage should have “no deliberate mind of his own” (wuxin) but instead should respond to life events spontaneously, without any discrimination. In short, this means that the sage puts aside desires because they are corrupting and destructive. Strictly speaking, the sage’s wuwei is not a strategy to diminish desire; it is evidence of the absence of desire -- emptiness, or Non-Being. In Wang’s view, Confucius was such a sage because his life had broadened the dao. (Analects 15.29) Such interpretations created fertile ground in which Buddhism could take root, thereby entering the Chinese intellectual stream through Daoism.

e. On Ziran

The Daoist concept of ziran (usually translated as “spontaneity” or “naturalness”) is interpreted by Wang Bi to mean “the real.” Likewise, in his commentary on the Daodejing, de is not a reference to virtue (as it usually is understood), or even less to specific virtues, but to that which persons obtain from dao (see ch. 51). Yet, for Wang, the text teaches that dao moves spontaneously and accomplishes its tasks. Providing for all, “nothing is done, but no thing is left undone.” Thus, Wang thinks that humans have created disorder by their thought and action. If they return to dao in wuwei, then de will become available as ziran. De will not be the result of human action, politics, or contrivance. If the ruler becomes a sage and embraces wuwei, he will transform the people and broaden the dao, just as Confucius (not Laozi) did.

4. Wang Bi’s Influence on Chinese Philosophy

Wang Bi’s metaphysics has influenced the development of Chinese philosophy in at least two important respects.

First, after Wang Bi, some Chinese literati began to distinguish “philosophical” Daoism (daojia) from “religious” Daoism (daojiao), a distinction that was reinforced by the geographical relocation of the tianshi movement and elite attempts to devalue it as a legitimate extension of classical Daoist thought. This distinction has persisted throughout the history of Chinese thought, but it is an unfortunate one, and moreover one without any basis in the historical practice of Daoist communities (Kirkland, 2). In constructing his interpretive framework, Wang avoided sectarian Daoism and did not take seriously the philosophical roots of tianshi thought. He made no serious attempt to consider how Daoism was practiced before the Han. Thus, Wang’s typology of Daoism laid the groundwork for what is arguably not only the most influential, but also the most systematically misleading, way of thinking about the development of Chinese philosophy.

Second, Wang’s commentary on the Daodejing was crucial for the process by which the Mahayana Buddhist dharma (doctrine, teaching) began to gain a foothold in China. The most obvious example of Wang’s influence can be seen in the way the Mahayana notion of emptiness was assimilated into Chinese thought. According to Wang, the Daodejing (ch. 40) asserts that being comes from nonbeing, and that nonbeing is the ultimate substance of being. As we have seen, he exploited the Daodejing’s analogies for emptiness, reading their meaning in terms of xuanxue. As Buddhist texts such as the Prajnaparamita (Transcendental Wisdom) Sutra were translated, clear connections were made between its teaching that all forms are empty and Wang’s reading of the dao. So, it became widely believed, or at least widely proclaimed, by early Chinese Buddhists that Laozi and Buddha had both taught the need for a return to non-being. Wang’s commentarial work played a strategic role in making this interpretation more convincing.

5. References and Further Reading

  • Ames, Roger and David L. Hall, trans. Daodejing -- Making This Life Significant: A Philosophical Translation. New York: Ballantine Books, 2003.
  • Chan, Alan. Two Visions of the Way: A Study of the Wang Pi and Ho-shang Kung Commentaries on the Lao-tzu. Albany, NY: State University of New York Press, 1991.
  • Chang, Chung-yue. “Wang Pi on the Mind.” Journal of Chinese Philosophy 9 (1982): 77-106.
  • Henricks, Robert, trans. Lao-Tzu: Te-Tao Ching. New York: Ballantine, 1989.
  • Ivanhoe, P.J., trans. The Daodejing of Laozi. New York: Seven Bridges, 2002.
  • Kirkland, Russell. “Understanding Taoism.” In Kirkland, Taoism: The Enduring Tradition (New York and London: Routledge, 2004), 1-19.
  • Kohn, Livia. Early Chinese Mysticism: Philosophy and Soteriology in the Taoist Tradition. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1992.
  • Lin, Paul, trans. A Translation of Lao-tzu’s Tao-te-ching and Wang Pi’s Commentary. Ann Arbor, MI: Center for Chinese Studies, University of Michigan, 1977.
  • Lou, Yu lie. Wang Bi ji jiaoshi (Critical Edition of Wang Bi’s Collected Works). 2 vols. Beijing: Zhonghua shuju, 1980.
  • Lynn, Richard, trans. The Classic of Changes: A New Translation of the I Ching as Interpreted by Wang Bi. New York: Columbia University Press, 1994.
  • Lynn, Richard, trans. The Classic of the Way and Virtue; A New Translation of the Tao-te Ching of Laozi as Interpreted by Wang Bi. New York: Columbia University Press, 1999.
  • Rump, Arian and Wing-tsit Chan, trans. Commentary on the Lao-tzu by Wang Pi. Honolulu: University of Hawai’i Press, 1979. .
  • Wagner, Rudolf. The Craft of the Chinese Commentator: Wang Bi on the Laozi. Albany, NY: State University of New York Press, 2000.
  • Wagner, Rudolf, trans. A Chinese Reading of the Daodejing: Wang Bi's Commentary on the Laozi with Critical Text and Translation. Albany, NY: State University of New York Press, 2003.
  • Wagner, Rudolf. Language, Ontology, and Political Philosophy in China: Wang Bi’s Scholarly Exploration of the Dark (Xuanxue). Albany, NY: State University of New York Press, 2003.

Author Information

Ronnie Littlejohn
Belmont University
U. S. A.

Protagoras (fl. 5th c. B.C.E.)

Protagoras of Abdera was one of several fifth century Greek thinkers (including also Gorgias, Hippias, and Prodicus) collectively known as the Older Sophists, a group of traveling teachers or intellectuals who were experts in rhetoric (the science of oratory) and related subjects. Protagoras is known primarily for three claims (1) that man is the measure of all things (which is often interpreted as a sort of radical relativism) (2) that he could make the "worse (or weaker) argument appear the better (or stronger)" and (3) that one could not tell if the gods existed or not. While some ancient sources claim that these positions led to his having been tried for impiety in Athens and his books burned, these stories may well have been later legends. Protagoras' notion that judgments and knowledge are in some way relative to the person judging or knowing has been very influential, and is still widely discussed in contemporary philosophy. Protagoras’ influence on the history of philosophy has been significant. Historically, it was in response to Protagoras and his fellow sophists that Plato began the search for transcendent forms or knowledge which could somehow anchor moral judgment. Along with the other Older Sophists and Socrates, Protagoras was part of a shift in philosophical focus from the earlier Presocratic tradition of natural philosophy to an interest in human philosophy. He emphasized how human subjectivity determines the way we understand, or even construct, our world, a position which is still an essential part of the modern philosophic tradition.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Career
  3. Doctrines
    1. Orthoepeia
    2. Man-Measure Statement
    3. Agnosticism
  4. Social Consequences and Immediate Followers
  5. Influence
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Life

Surprising little is known of Protagoras' life with any certainty. Our main sources of information concerning Protagoras are:

  1. Plato (427-347 B.C.E.): Protagoras is a leading character in Plato's dialogue Protagoras and Protagoras' doctrines are discussed extensively in Plato's Theaetetus. Plato's dialogues, however, are a mixture of historical account and artistic license, much in the manner of the comic plays of the period. Moreover, Protagoras died when Plato was quite young and Plato may have depended on not entirely reliable second-hand evidence for his understanding of Protagoras.
  2. Diogenes Laertius (third century C.E.): Diogenes' Lives of the Philosophers is probably our single most extensive source for many early Greek philosophers' works and biographies. Unfortunately, his work was compiled over six hundred years after Protagoras' death and is an uncritical compilation of materials from a wide variety of sources, some reliable, some not, and many hopelessly garbled.
  3. Sextus Empiricus (fl. late 2nd century C.E.): Sextus Empiricus was a skeptic of the Pyrrhonian school. Sextus wrote several books criticizing the dogmatists (non-skeptics). His treatment of Protagoras is somewhat favorable, but since his purpose is to prove the superiority of Pyrrhonism to all other philosophies,we cannot trust him to be "objective" in a modern sense; moreover, like Diogenes, he wrote several hundred years after Protagoras' death and may not have had completely reliable sources.

The first step in understanding Protagoras is to define the general category of "sophist," a term often applied to Protagoras in antiquity. In the fifth century, the term referred mainly to people who were known for their knowledge (for example, Socrates, the seven sages) and those who earned money by teaching advanced pupils (for example, Protagoras, Prodicus) and seemed to be a somewhat neutral term, although sometimes used with pejorative overtones by those who disapproved of the new ideas of the so-called "Sophistic Enlightenment". By the fourth century the term becomes more specialized, limited to those who taught rhetoric, specifically the ability to speak in assemblies or law courts. Because sophistic skills could promote injustice (demagoguery in assemblies, winning unjust lawsuits) as well as justice (persuading the polis to act correctly, allowing the underprivileged to win justice for themselves), the term "sophist" gradually acquired the negative connotation of cleverness not restrained by ethics. Conventionally, the term "Older Sophist" is restricted to a small number of figures known from the Platonic dialogues (Protagoras, Gorgias, Prodicus, Hippias, Euthydemus, Thrasymachus and sometimes others). Whether these figures actually had some common body of doctrines is uncertain. At times scholars have tended to lump them together in a group, and attribute to them all a combination of religious skepticism, skill in argument, epistemological and moral relativism, and a certain degree of intellectual unscrupulousness. These characteristics, though, were probably more typical of their fourth century followers than of the Older Sophists themselves, who tended to agree with and follow generally accepted moral codes, even while their more abstract speculations undermined the epistemological foundations of traditional morality.

When we separate Protagoras from general portraits of "sophistic", as most scholars (for example, the ones listed below in the bibliography) recommend, our information about him is relatively sparse. He was born in approximately 490 B. C. E. in the town of Abdera in Thrace and died c. 420 B. C. E. (place unknown). He traveled around Greece earning his living primarily as a teacher and perhaps advisor and lived in Athens for several years, where he associated with Pericles and other rich and influential Athenians. Pericles invited him to write the constitution for the newly founded Athenian colony of Thurii in 444 B. C. E. Many later legends developed around the life of Protagoras which are probably false, including stories concerning his having studied with Democritus, his trial for impiety, the burning of his books, and his flight from Athens.

2. Career

If our knowledge of Protagoras' life is sparse, our knowledge of his career is vague. Protagoras was probably the first Greek to earn money in higher education and he was notorious for the extremely high fees he charged. His teaching included such general areas as public speaking, criticism of poetry, citizenship, and grammar. His teaching methods seemed to consist primarily of lectures, including model orations, analyses of poems, discussions of the meanings and correct uses of words, and general rules of oratory. His audience consisted mainly of wealthy men, from Athens' social and commercial elites. The reason for his popularity among this class had to do with specific characteristics of the Athenian legal system.

Athens was an extremely litigious society. Not only were various political and personal rivalries normally carried forward by lawsuits, but one special sort of taxation, know as "liturgies" could result in a procedure known as an "antidosis" (exchange). A liturgy was a public expense (such as providinga ship for the navy or supporting a religious festival) assigned to one of the richest men of the community. If a man thought he had been assigned the liturgy unfairly, because there was a richer man able to undertake it, he could bring a lawsuit either to exchange his property with the other man's or to shift the burden of the liturgy to the richer man. Since Athenians had to represent themselves in court rather than hiring lawyers, it was essential that rich men learn to speak well in order to defend their property; if they could not do so, they would be at the mercy of anyone who wanted to extort money from them. While this made the teachings of Protagoras extremely valuable, it also led a certain conservative faction (for example, the comic playwright Aristophanes) to distrust him, in the same way that people now might distrust a slick lawyer.

3. Doctrines

Protagoras' doctrines can be divided into three groups:

  1. Orthoepeia: the study of the correct use of words
  2. Man-measure statement: the notion that knowledge is relative to the knower
  3. Agnosticism: the claim that we cannot know anything about the gods

a. Orthoepeia

Perhaps because the practical side of his teaching was concerned with helping students learn to speak well in the courtroom, Protagoras was interested in "orthoepeia" (the correct use of words). Later sources describe him as one of the first to write on grammar (in the modern sense of syntax) and he seems interested in the correct meaning of words, a specialty often associated with another sophist, Prodicus, as well. In the Protagoras, the Platonic dialogue named after the famous sophist which has both Protagoras and Prodicus as participants, Protagoras is shown interpreting a poem of Simonides, with special concern for the issue of the relationship between the writer's intent and the literal meanings of the words. This method of interpretation was one which would be especially useful in interpreting laws and other written witnesses (contracts, wills, and so forth) in the courtroom. Unfortunately, we don't have any actual writings by Protagoras on the topic.

b. Man-Measure Statement

Of the book titles we have attributed to Protagoras, only two, "Truth" (or "Refutations") and "On the Gods" are probably accurate. Of Protagoras' works, only a few brief quotations embedded in the works of later authors have survived. (The quotations of and reports about Protagoras below are referred to by their 'Diels-Kranz,' or 'DK' number, the usual way of referring to such fragments and testimonia. The Diels-Kranz numbering system is explained here.) Of Protagoras' ipsissima verba (actual words, as opposed to paraphrases), the most famous is the homo-mensura (man-measure) statement (DK80b1): "Of all things the measure is man, of the things that are, that [or "how"] they are, and of things that are not, that [or "how"] they are not." This precise meaning of this statement, like that of any short extract taken out of context, is far from obvious, although the long discussion of it in Plato's Theaetetus gives us some sense of how ancient Greek audiences interpreted it. The test case normally used is temperature. If Ms. X. says "it is hot," then the statement (unless she is lying) is true for her. Another person, Ms. Y, may simultaneously claim "it is cold." This statement could also be true for her. If Ms. X normally lives in Alaska and Ms. Y in Florida, the same temperature (e. g. 25 Celsius) may seem hot to one and cool to the other. The measure of hotness or coldness is fairly obviously the individual person. One cannot legitimately tell Ms. X she does not feel hot -- she is the only person who can accurately report her own perceptions or sensations. In this case, it is indeed impossible to contradict as Protagoras is held to have said (DK80a19). But what if Ms. Y, in claiming it feels cold, suggests that unless the heat is turned on the pipes will freeze? One might suspect that she has a fever and her judgment is unreliable; the measure may still be the individual person, but it is an unreliable one, like a broken ruler or unbalanced scale. In a modern scientific culture, with a predilection for scientific solutions, we would think of consulting a thermometer to determine the objective truth. The Greek response was to look at the more profound philosophical implications.

Even if the case of whether the pipes will freeze can be solved trivially, the problem of it being simultaneously hot and cold to two women remains interesting. If this cannot be resolved by determining that one has a fever, we are presented with evidence that judgments about qualities are subjective. If this is the case though, it has alarming consequences. Abstractions like truth, beauty, justice, and virtue are also qualities and it would seem that Protagoras' dictum would lead us to conclude that they too are relative to the individual observer, a conclusion which many conservative Athenians found alarming because of its potential social consequences. If good and bad are merely what seem good and bad to the individual observer, then how can one claim that stealing or adultery or impiety or murder are somehow wrong? Moreover, if something can seem both hot and cold (or good and bad) then both claims, that the thing is hot and that the thing is cold, can be argued for equally well. If adultery is both good and bad (good for one person and bad for another), then one can construct equally valid arguments for and against adultery in general or an individual adulterer. What will make a case triumph in court is not some inherent worth of one side, but the persuasive artistry of the orator. And so, Protagoras claims he is able to "make the worse case the better" (DK80b6). The oratorical skills Protagoras taught thus had potential for promoting what most Athenians considered injustice or immorality.

c. Agnosticism

While the pious might wish to look to the gods to provide absolute moral guidance in the relativistic universe of the Sophistic Enlightenment, that certainty also was cast into doubt by philosophic and sophistic thinkers, who pointed out the absurdity and immorality of the conventional epic accounts of the gods. Protagoras' prose treatise about the gods began "Concerning the gods, I have no means of knowing whether they exist or not or of what sort they may be. Many things prevent knowledge including the obscurity of the subject and the brevity of human life." (DK80b4)

4. Social Consequences and Immediate Followers

As a consequence of Protagoras' agnosticism and relativism, he may have considered that laws (legislative and judicial) were things which evolved gradually by agreement (brought about by debate in democratic assemblies) and thus could be changed by further debate. This position would imply that there was a difference between the laws of nature and the customs of humans. Although Protagoras himself seemed to respect, and even revere the customs of human justice (as a great achievement), some of the younger followers of Protagoras and the other Older Sophists concluded that the arbitrary nature of human laws and customs implies that they can be ignored at will, a position that was held to be one of the causes of the notorious amorality of such figures as Alcibiades.

Protagoras himself was a fairly traditional and upright moralist. He may have viewed his form of relativism as essentially democratic — allowing people to revise unjust or obsolete laws, defend themselves in court, free themselves from false certainties -- but he may equally well have considered rhetoric a way in which the elite could counter the tendencies towards mass rule in the assemblies. Our evidence on this matter is unfortunately minimal.

The consequences of the radical skepticism of the sophistic enlightenment appeared, at least to Plato and Aristophanes, among others, as far from benign. In Aristophanes' play, the Clouds, a teacher of rhetoric (called Socrates, but with doctrines based to a great degree on those of the Sophists, and possibly directed specifically at Protagoras or his followers) teaches that the gods don't exist, moral values are not fixed, and how to make the weaker argument appear the stronger. The result is moral chaos -- the main characters (Strepsiades and his son Pheidippides) in Clouds are portrayed as learning clever tricks to enable them to cheat their creditors and eventually abandoning all sense of conventional morality (illustrated by Pheidippides beating his father on stage and threatening to beat his mother). Although no one accused Protagoras himself of being anything other than honest -- even Plato, who disapproved of his philosophical positions, portrays him as generous, courteous, and upright -- his techniques were adopted by various unscrupulous characters in the following generation, giving sophistry the bad name it still has for clever (but fallacious) verbal trickery.

5. Influence

Protagoras' influence on the history of philosophy has been significant. Historically, it was in response to Protagoras and his fellow sophists that Plato began the search for transcendent forms or knowledge which could somehow anchor moral judgment. Along with the other Older Sophists and Socrates, Protagoras was part of a shift in philosophical focus from the earlier Presocratic tradition of natural philosophy to an interest in human philosophy. He emphasized how human subjectivity determines the way we understand, or even construct, our world, a position which is still an essential part of the modern philosophic tradition.

6. References and Further Reading

a. Primary sources

  • Aristophanes. Clouds. Intro. and trans. by Carol Poster. In Aristophanes 3, ed. David Slavitt and Palmer Bovie. Philadelphia PA: University of Pennsylvania Press, 1999: 85-192.
  • Diels, Hermann. Die Fragmente der Vorsokratiker. Rev. Walther Kranz. Berlin: Weidmann, 1972-1973.
  • Diogenes Laertius. Lives Of Eminent Philosophers. Trans. R. D. Hicks. 2 vols. Cambridge MA: Harvard University Press, 1959.
  • Plato. Plato II: Laches, Protagoras, Meno, Euthydemus. Trans. W. R. M. Lamb. Cambridge MA: Harvard University Press, 1967.
  • Plato. Plato VII: Theaetetus, Sophist. Trans. H. N. Fowler. Cambridge MA: Harvard University Press, 1925.
  • Sextus Empiricus. Sextus Empiricus. Trans. R. G. Bury. 4 vols. Cambridge MA: Harvard University Press, 1953-59.
  • Sprague, Rosamund Kent, ed. The Older Sophists: A Complete Translation by Several Hands. Columbia SC: University of South Carolina Press, 1972.

b. Secondary sources

  • Guthrie, W. K. C. The Sophists. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1971
  • de Romilly, Jaqueline. The Great Sophists In Periclean Athens. Trans. Janet Lloyd. Oxford: The Clarendon Press, 1992.
  • Kennedy, George. The Art Of Persuasion In Greece. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1963.
  • Kerferd, G. B. The Sophistic Movement. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1981.
  • Rankin, H. D. Sophists, Socratics & Cynics. London: Croom Helm, 1983.
  • Schiappa, Edward. Protagoras and Logos. Columbia S.C.: University of South Carolina Press 1991.

Author Information

Carol Poster
Florida State University
U. S. A.

Pseudo-Dionysius the Areopagite (fl. c. 650—c. 725 C.E.)

Dionysius is the author of three long treatises (The Divine Names, The Celestial Hierarchy, and The Ecclesiastical Hierarchy) one short treatise (The Mystical Theology) and ten letters expounding various aspects of Christian Philosophy from a mystical and Neoplatonic perspective. Presenting himself as Dionysius the Areopagite, the disciple of Paul mentioned in Acts 17:34, his writings had the status of apostolic authority until the 19th century when studies had shown the writings denoted a marked influence from the Athenian Neoplatonic school of Proclus and thus were probably written ca. 500.  Although the attribution of authorship has proven to be a falsification, the unknown author (hereafter referred to as Ps-Dionysius) has not lost his credibility as an articulate Athenian Neoplatonist expressing an authentic Christian mystical tradition. Indeed with eloquent poetic language and strong exposition of ideas, the Dionysian corpus ranks among the classics of western spirituality.

Table of Contents

  1. History and Development of Christian Platonism up to Pseudo-Dionysius
  2. Mystery Schools, Gnosticism, Hermeticism, and the "Platonic Underground"
  3. The Works of Dionysius the Areopagite
    1. The Divine Names (13 Chapters)
    2. The Mystical Theology (5 Chapters)
    3. The Celestial Hierarchy (15 Chapters)
    4. The Ecclesiastical Hierarchy (7 Chapters)
    5. The Epistles (10 Letters)
  4. The Dionysian Influence
    1. Philosophy
    2. Mysticism
    3. Occultism (Esoteric traditions of Alchemy, Hermetism, Kabbalah)
  5. References and Further Reading

1. History and Development of Christian Platonism up to Pseudo-Dionysius

Born within a 500-year old Graeco-Roman culture, Christianity received a pervasive influence from the then 400-year old Platonist tradition very early on. Despite the official outlawing of so-called pagan philosophy in the 6th century, Platonism or Neoplatonism, continued to maintain a dynamically evolving influence for the ensuing thousand years within the sphere of Christianity and beyond that, interest in Platonism is waxing strong today. In general, the prominent early Christian Platonists were men already possessing a classical Graeco-Roman culture and schooled in the Middle Platonic tradition and who would subsequently convert to Christianity thus bringing their background and knowledge to the service of their new faith. Already, Philo of Alexandria (20 BC - 40 AD) had developed an extensive Middle Platonic interpretation of the Jewish scriptures (scriptural symbology, logos theology, moral philosophy, etc.). With the solid framework provided by Philo, Alexandria became the home of the first Christian Platonists: Clement (160 - 220) and Origen (185 -253) who both in their own way crafted a considerable system of correspondences between Platonism and Christianity. The influence of Neoplatonism can be seen with the Cappadocian fathers Basil (330-379), Gregory Nazianzus (329 - 389), and Gregory of Nyssa (331/40 - ca. 395); as well as Synesius of Cyrene (373? - 414). Origen's influence continued with the fathers of the Egyptian desert, Macarius (295 - 386), Evagrius Pontus (345 - 399), and John Cassian (+350). The Neoplatonic influence appears in the Latin Church with Marius Victorinus (281/291- ?), Ambrose (354 - 450), Augustine (354 - 430),  and Boethius (460? - 524). Philiponus (fl. 500?) is a Christian Neoplatonist who studied with the last teachers of the pagan Athenian school.

2. Mystery Schools, Gnosticism, Hermeticism, and the "Platonic Underground"

In accordance with his Neoplatonic background, Ps-Dionysius adopts the initiation language of the Mystery religions. Basically, the Mystery religions can be considered as the esoteric counterpart to the exoteric popular religions. The symbols and mythology of popular cults of worship are thought to contain an esoteric meaning which reveal a deeper mystical knowledge. The pledge of secrecy being integral to the Mystery religions, comparatively little information about them has come down to us. There seems to be a stock of similar myths, symbols, and ritual common to all of them and their influence was pervasive in both the Pagan and Christian world:

The Soul was the one subject, and the knowledge of the Soul the one object of all the ancient Mysteries. In the 'Fall' of PISTIS-SOPHIA, and her rescue by her Syzygy, JESUS, we see the ever-enacted drama of the suffering and ignorant Personality, which can only be saved by the immortal Individuality or rather by its own yearning towards IT (H. P. Blavatsky, "Commentary on the Pistis-Sophia," in Collected Writings, Vol. XIII, The Theosophical Publishing House, Wheaton: 1982, p. 40).

The Neoplatonic schools at this period can be considered to represent a middle ground between the pagan esoteric cults  [Hellenic Mysteries, Oriental Mystery cults (Mithraism, Attis), Hermetism, Greek alchemists (Zosimos)] and the popular state forms of religious worship. Whether a Christian Neoplatonist such as Ps-Dionysius played a similar mediating role between the exoteric forms of Judeo-Christianity (popular Roman Catholic state religion) and esoteric Christianity (Gnosticism, Arianism, Docetism) would be a matter of conjecture, but what is interesting is how the Dionysian corpus formulates a creative philosophical synthesis that reflects a more open Christian position in a period when all the above-mentioned religious movements where in a very dynamic state of ferment and conflict which saw the rise of Christianity and the waning of Paganism.

3. The Works of Dionysius the Areopagite

There are five works ascribed to Dionysius:  The Divine Names, The Mystical Theology, The Celestial Hierarchy, The Ecclesiastical Hierarchy and his Epistles.  All of these works are interrelated and, taken together, form a complex whole.  Paul Rorem gives a very good overview of how these works unfold:

The point here is that not all affirmations concerning God are equally inappropriate; they are arranged in a descending order of decreasing congruity.  Affirmative theology begins with the loftier, more congruous comparisons and then proceeds "down" to the less appropriate ones.  Thus, as the author reminds us, The Theological Representations [not extant] began with God's oneness and proceeded down into the multiplicity of affirming the Trinity and the incarnation.  The Divine Names then affirmed the more numerous designations for God which come from mental concepts, while The Symbolic Theology [not extant] "descended" into the still more pluralized realm of sense perception and its plethora of symbols for the deity.  This pattern of descending affirmations and ascending negations can be interpreted in terms of late Neoplatonism's "procession" from the One down into plurality and the "return" of all back to the One. In the "return," not all negations concerning God are equally appropriate; the attributes to be negated are arranged in an ascending order of decreasing incongruity, first considering and negating the lowest or most obviously false statements about God and then moving up to deny these that may seem more congruous.  Thus the first to be denied are the perceptible attributes, starting with The Mystical Theology, Chapter 4, which therefore previews the two subsequent treatises on perceptible symbols, The Celestial Hierarchy and The Ecclesiastical Hierarchy.  Chapter 2 of the former work will continue the theme of negating and transcending symbols, namely, interpreting first the most incongruous of the perceptible symbols attributed to the celestial, whether to the angels or to God.  The anagogical or uplifting method of interpretation in these two treatises incorporates into itself the principles of negative theology.  Both the spatial, material depiction of the angels in the scriptures and also the temporal, sequential images of God in the liturgy must be transcended in the ascent from the perceptible to the intelligible.  Thus, "as we climb higher," Chapter 5 of The Mystical Theology denies and moves beyond all our concepts or "conceptual" attributes of God and concludes by abandoning all speech and thought, even negations. (Pseudo-Dionysius, The Complete Works,  New York: Paulist Press 1987, p.140 note).

a. The Divine Names (13 Chapters)

Chapter 1 Dionysius the Elder to Timothy the Fellow Elder:  What the goal of this discourse is, and the tradition regarding the divine names. A general introduction in which God is considered omniscient, beyond all human understanding and description and therefore can only be expressed through symbols, names which are found in the scriptures.  One can approach the truth of God through contemplation of the Divine Symbols. The conception of God is a philosophical one, akin to  the One, or the Good of  Neoplatonism, and not  anthropomorphic Old Testament God of popular theology.

Chapter 2 Concerning the unified and differentiated Word of God, and what the divine unity and differentiation is.
The Neoplatonic concept of emanation finds its counterpart in the "divine procession."  Jesus Christ is considered to be a mystery that is beyond human contemplation.

Chapter 3 The power of praying, concerning the blessed Hierotheus, piety and our theology. Here the author speaks of his teacher Hierotheus and refers to a work of his entitled "Elements of Theology" which is not extant.

Chapter 4 Concerning "God," "Light," "Beautiful," "Love," "Ecstasy," and "Zeal" and that evil is neither a being, nor from a being, nor in beings. Here begins the metaphysical explanations of the Divine Names taken from the scriptures.  Also explained is the mystical concept of "yearning" for union with the Good and the Beautiful.  The philosophical explanation of evil is evidently much more Platonic than the anthropomorphic concept of evil as expressed by the conventional church dogma. (The parallels on the discussion of evil to the De Malorum Subsistentia of Proclus provided the initial clues in proving the pseudonymous authorship.)

Chapter 5 Concerning "Being" and also concerning paradigms. The metaphysical causes of Being are discussed.

Chapter 6 Concerning "Life." The transcendent, absolute, eternal nature of life is dealt with.

Chapter 7 Concerning "Wisdom," "Mind," "Truth," "Faith." The basis of a divine, transcendent wisdom where humans derive their intelligence and understanding through participation with the Divine Mind is discussed.

Chapter 8 Concerning "Power," "Righteousness," "Salvation," "Redemption," and also inequality. This chapter deals with the ordering of the universe according to divine laws by which a transcendent order maintains the dynamic harmony of all things.

Chapter 9 Concerning greatness and smallness, sameness and difference, similarity and dissimilarity, rest, motion, equality. It is shown how the fundamental unity of God can be seen in the multiplicity of the universe at the macrocosmic and microcosmic levels.

Chapter 10 Concerning "Omnipotent,"  "Ancient of Days," and also concerning "Eternity" and "Time." This chapter deals with the philosophical aspects of time and eternity.

Chapter 11 Concerning "Peace," and what is intended by "being itself," "power itself" and things said in this vein. The intelligent harmony which brings things together in a communion of concord is discussed.

Chapter 12 Concerning "Holy of Holies," "King of Kings," "Lord of Lords," "God of Gods." Holy of Holies deals with Purity; Kingship, with law and order; Lordship, stability through possession of the Good and the Beautiful, God, Providence which sees everything.

Chapter 13 Concerning "Perfect"  and "One." Here is a synthesis of the whole work, returning to the idea of the One as discussed in Neoplatonic terms.

b. The Mystical Theology (5 Chapters)

Chapter 1 An explanation of Ps-Dionysius' negative theology in which one rises to high levels of divine contemplation by defining God by what it is not because it is beyond assertion and denial.

Chapter 2 How one should be united to, and attribute praises to the cause of all things which is beyond all things.

Chapter 3 What are the affirmative theologies and what are the negative.  The higher we rise towards the transcendent, the more language fails to describe it.

Chapter 4 That the supreme cause of every perceptible thing is not itself perceptible.  The negative theology begins by denying it all formal existence perceptible by the senses.

Chapter 5 It is stated that the supreme Cause of every conceptual thing is not itself conceptual.  We are to apprehend it by rising to the highest concepts and then going beyond where neither assertion nor denial can be attributed to it.

c. The Celestial Hierarchy (15 Chapters)

Chapter 1 That every divine illumination, descending with goodness and according to different modes to the object of its providence, remains nonetheless simple, and indeed unifies what it illumines. The treatise begins with an explanation of the value of the symbol as a representation of spiritual essences.

Chapter 2 It is appropriate to reveal the mysteries of God and of heaven with symbols without resemblance. Here it is explained that the many images and symbols in the Bible are not meant to be taken at dead letter face value.  As man is incapable of contemplating Divine Truth directly, our divinely inspired ancestors have left us symbols adapted to our capacity of understanding which help us to raise our consciousness to the understanding and contemplation of the divine truths;  the second function of the symbol is that it also serves as a veil to these sacred truths for those who it would be imprudent to reveal these things to.  The value of the symbol therefore depends on the person's capacity to penetrate its secrets.

Chapter 3 In what does the Hierarchy consist of and what is its use. The notion of hierarchy is that seeing that not everyone can equally directly contemplate and participate in the supreme cause, there is therefore a great chain of hierarchies emanating from the most spiritual origins down to the most material planes.  To undertake the divine ascension, there are intermediaries for every level of reality like the steps on a ladder.  The higher hierarchies, receiving a more direct illumination, can transmit that light to the lower hierarchies at the level they are able to perceive it and the higher hierarchies also serve as an accessible image of the transcendent, an example for the hierarchy immediately below, whose members can contemplate in order to rise to a higher level.  The closer a hierarchy is to the source of divine light, the greater the degree of purity and simplicity and resemblance to the source.

Chapter 4 What the names given to the angels signify. An interesting point concerning the hierarchies is that no human being can directly contemplate the ultimate Source.  Even Moses did not have a direct vision of God but rather a vision adapted to his level of perception.  It is shown how the incarnation of Christ was done in accord with the hierarchical order of angels.

Chapter 5 Why are all the celestial essences distinctly called angels. On the hierarchical scales the angels are at the lowest degree of the hierarchy.  This is because the higher levels contain all the illumination and power of the lower levels; but the lower do not have the same level of participation with the higher.  Therefore the term angel is used because, in a sense, it is the lowest common denominator.

Chapter 6 What is the first order of the celestial essences, what is the middle order and what is the inferior order.
All the names of the hierarchies appear in the scriptures.  They are divided into three groups of three hierarchies each:

First - Seraphim, Cherubim and Thrones
Second - Dominions, Virtues and Powers
Third - Principalities, Archangels and Angels

Chapter 7 Of the Seraphim, the Cherubim and the Thrones and of the first hierarchy that they constitute. The meaning of the first three angelic hierarchies are as follows:

Seraphim - Fire, "Those who burn"
Cherubim - Messengers of knowledge, Wisdom
Thrones - Seat of God

Chapter 8 Of the Dominions, the Virtues and the Powers and the middle hierarchy that they constitute. The meaning of the second order of the hierarchies are as follows:

Dominions - Justice
Virtues - Courage, Virility
Powers - Order, Harmony

Chapter 9 Of the Principalities, the Archangels and the Angels and of the last hierarchy that they constitute. The meaning of the third order are as follows:

Principalities - Authority
Archangels - Unity
Angels - Revelation, messengers

Chapter 10 Recapitulation and conclusion concerning the proper ordering of the angelic hierarchy. Each order, therefore has in itself three orders - first, middle and last.  It is said that none of the orders are totally perfect; all the hierarchies thus mutually participate in a constant  march, striving towards perfection.

Chapter 11 Why all the celestial essences receive in common the name of the celestial powers. The celestial powers have three qualities - essence, power and act.

Chapter 12 Why do the highest of high priests receive the name of angels. Why are priests called angels?  Because although the lower orders do not participate of the higher orders per se, the illuminations of the higher orders do radiate all the way through to the lowest orders in a gradually decreasing brightness, therefore it can be said that the lower can receive the light of the higher in an indirect manner.

Chapter 13 Why is it said that it is the Seraphim that purified the prophet Isaiah. In the Bible, when Isaiah was purified by a Seraphim, it is not to be understood that he was in direct contact with such an immeasurably high order; what is meant is that the illuminating properties and powers of the order of the Seraphim had descended through the several intermediary orders to purify Isaiah.  It is a question of opacity and translucency in regards to the light.  Light shines and its rays can pass through substances depending on its degree of translucency, will reflect more or less of the light.  This analogy applies to human consciousness in relation to divine light.

Chapter 14 What does the number attributed to the angels signify. It is stated that there are an immeasurable number of angels in every order, and therefore a truly infinite number of angels are acting in the various planes of the universe.  There is an angel overlooking the welfare of every nation as well.

Chapter 15 What are the figurative images of the angelic powers. This chapter discusses the various symbols in reference to the angelic functions such as fire; man; infant; sacred clothes and instruments; air, wind and clouds; metals and stones; animals.

d. The Ecclesiastical Hierarchy (7 Chapters)

Chapter 1 What is the tradition of the ecclesiastical hierarchy and what is its purpose. It is explained how the tradition began initially with a divine transmission of sacred symbols and forms which were thereafter transmitted to succeeding generations.

Chapter 2. 1 The rite of illumination.
The goal of the hierarchy is "greatest likeness and union with god through obedience of the commandments and doing the sacred acts."  And the first initiation is the divine birth, meaning birth to a spiritual life.

2.2 A postulant who wishes to enter the spiritual life has a sponsor who presents him to the hierarch.  The postulant goes through various ritual gestures including being anointed with oil and immersed in water three times.  It is a baptism.

2.3 This is a practical applications of the symbols.  The rituals are not merely functional gestures but are meant to convey actual transformation processes in the candidates consciousness.  For example, the immersion in water symbolizes a dissolution of the old material way of life to reemerge into the spiritual which is further symbolized by putting on bright new clothes and fragrant ointments. Firm opposition to whatever hinders our communion, brave resolution in striving to uplift oneself and a will for victory over the forces of death and destruction is stressed.

Chapter 3.1 The rite of the synaxis.
Or the Eucharist.  What these initiation operations do is by granting communion, it gives the participants an inner unity by gathering together the divided  and scattered  fragments of our consciousness.

3.2 Mystery of the synaxis or communion. The Eucharist is the ritual re-enactment of the last supper.

3.3 A symbolic explanation of the Eucharist is explained as well as the value of Christ's example that we should strive to imitate.  There is also different levels of participation in the ceremonies according to one's level of purification, clarity of vision, and freedom from fantasies.

Chapter 4.1 The ritual of ointment and what is perfected by it. The ointment is the third of the three holy sacraments explained.

4.2 Mystery of the sacred ointment. This consists in consecrating the sacred ointment used for almost all the sacraments of sanctification and rites of consecration.

4.3 Perfecting and consecrating with ointment - symbolizes a visitation of the Divine Spirit.

Chapter 5.1 Concerning the clerical orders, powers, activities, and consecrations. Here are three orders which are a reflection of the triple order of the celestial hierarchy.  And these orders have a further triple division.  Furthermore they have a triple power of purification, illumination  and perfection.

1-  Hierarchs - Sanctification of clerical orders, consecration of ointment  and rite of purification and consecration of the Holy butter.
2-  Priests - Illumination
3-  Deacons -  Purification

5.2 The mystery of the clerical consecrations of the three orders. The various rites of consecration of the three orders are explained.

5.3 The hierarch does not work the consecration through his own personal authority but is rather an intermediary for the Divine Powers.

Chapter 6.1 Concerning the orders of those being initiated. Various categories of candidates who will approach the mysteries are detailed:

1-  The three orders of candidates receiving direct instruction (incubation, instruction).
2-  Those who fell away and are returning to the church.
3-  Those who are weak, fearful and require strengthening.
4-  Those who have lived a life of  sin and need  sanctification.
5-  Those who are attentive to the spiritual life but lack firmness in practice.

There is then an intermediate level - those ready to enter upon the path of contemplation; candidate priests for illumination.
There is also the order of monks - they are considered purified and have complete power and holiness in its own activities within the hierarchies.

6.2 Mystery of the consecration of a monk. The monastic profession and tonsure is explained.

6.3 Renunciation of all activities in act and thought that distract from the sacred life is  stressed.  The correspondence of purification, illumination and perfection with the celestial hierarchies is explained.

Chapter 7.1 The rite for the dead. Dying is called a sacred rebirth.

7.2 Mystery regarding those who died sacredly. The rites are explained for those who belong to the orders.

7.3 The rewards are not equal for all. One will live in a state of blessedness in the afterlife corresponding to the degree of saintliness one has achieved in material life. This  treatise closes on a point concerning baptism of children.  The idea of baptism at a young age is that it is considered good to develop sacred habits at a young age and the baptism is effected only if it is agreed that the child be entrusted to a spiritual parent who will afterwards provide them with a religious education.

e. The Epistles (10 Letters)

Letter 1 - To the monk, Gaius- Deals with negative theology.

Letter 2 - To the monk, Gaius- Is a discussion on the Good.

Letter 3 - To the monk, Gaius- Deals with the mystery of Jesus.

Letter 4 - To the monk, Gaius- Of the transcendent character of Jesus; the humanity of Jesus is emphasized.

Letter 5 - To Dorotheus, deacon- Deals with negative theology.

Letter 6 - To Sosipater, Priest- Denis is against the denunciation of cults who express a different point of view than Christianity.

Letter 7 - To Polycarp, a hierarch-  Regarding a discussion with Apollophanes, a sophist, Ps-Dionysius counsels not to refute his opinions but simply establish the truth as clearly as he can and let the validity of his explanations stand for themselves.  There is a reference to the Mithraic cult as well as to various Christian miracles.

Letter 8 To Demophilus, a monk-  This is the longest of the letters and concerns a monk who turned away a repenting sinner who wished to return to the church.  Ps-Dionysius disapproves  of the monk's actions and extols the virtue of meekness, kindness and tolerance in which reason governs anger.  There are also many details concerning the practical functioning of the ecclesiastical hierarchy and the authority and respect that the respective ranks should command.  The letter ends with a personal relating of a miraculous vision of a certain Carpos illustrating the  mercifulness of Jesus.

Letter 9 To Titus, Hierarch-  A question concerning the symbolism of the mixing bowl and food and drink as spiritual nourishment is dealt with.

Letter 10 To John the theologian- In this letter, words of comfort and support to an exiled apostle are conveyed.

4. The Dionysian Influence

The Dionysian corpus has had an wide influence on various aspects of Christian thought. The following list is divided into three general currents of influence:  philosophy, mysticism and occultism. By no means comprehensive, this list aims to simply give a general overview of some prominent thinkers in the Christian Platonist tradition. The three categories are very general and the categorization loose, as many people on this list could easily overlap into several categories.

a. Philosophy

Maximus Confessor (580 - 662), Alcuin (730 - 806), John Scotus Eriugena (fl. 850), Michael Psellus (1018 - 1096), Hugh of St-Victor (+1141), Richard of St-Victor (+1173), Thomas Aquinas (1125 - 1274), Thiery of Chartres (fl. 1142 -1150), Robert Grosseteste (1175 - ca. 1225?) Bonaventure (1221 - 1274), Gemisthos Plethon (ca. 1370? - 1450), Nicholas of Cusa (1401 - 1464), Denis the Carthusian (1402 - 1471), Marsilio Ficino (1433 - 1499), Lefebvre d'Etaples (1436 -1520), Thomas Vaughan (1622 - 1666).

b. Mysticism

Bernard of Clairvaux (1091 -1153), Hildegarde of Bingen (1098 - 1179), Jacopone da Todi (1128 -  1306), Meister Eckhart (1260 - 1327), John Tauler (1300 -1361), Henry Suso (ca. 1295 - 1365), John Ruysbroeck (1293 - 1381), Henry de Mayle (ca. 1360 - 1415), Catherine of Sienna (1347 -1380), Jean Gerson (1363 - 1409), Francisco de Orsuna (+1540), Teresa of Avila (1515 - 1582), John of the Cross (1515 - 1582), Augustine Baker (1575 -1641), unknown author of the Cloud of Unknowing (ca. 1350 - 1395)

c. Occultism (Esoteric traditions of Alchemy, Hermetism, Kabbalah)

Albert the Great (1206 - 1240), Roger Bacon (1210/14 - ca. 1292), Dante (1265 - 1321), Ramon Lully (1232 - 1316?), Johannes Reuchlin (1455 -1522), Johannes Trithemius (1462 -1516), Pico de la Mirandola (1463 - 1494), Francesco Giorgi (1466 -1540),  Cornelius Agrippa (1486 - 1534), John Dee (1537 -1608), Giordano Bruno (1548 - 1600), Robert Fludd (1574-1637) Jacob Boehme (1575 - 1624), William Law (1686 -1761), Eckhartausen (1752 -1803), Louis-Claude de St-Martin (1743 -1803), William Blake (1757 -1827).

5. References and Further Reading

  • Dillon, John, The Middle Platonists, Duckworth, Great Britain, 1977.
  • Ferguson, Everett  (ed.), Encyclopedia of Early Christianity, Garland Publishing, New York, 1990.
  • Finan, Thomas; Twaney, Vincent (eds.), The Relationship between Neoplatonism and Christianity, Four Courts Press, Dublin, 1992.
  • Luibheid, Colm (transl.), Pseudo-Dionysius: The Complete Works, Paulist Press (Classics of Western Spirituality), New York, 1987.
  • Livraga, Jorge Angel, Manuel d'Introduction aux philosophies d'orient et d'occident, Nouvelle Acropole, France.
  • O'Leary, Dominic J., Neoplatonism and Christian Thought, State University Press, New York, 1982.
  • Underhill, Evelyn, Mysticism, Meridian, Noonday Press, New-York, 1955.
  • Yates, Frances A., Giordano Bruno and the Hermetic Tradition, Routledge and Kegan Paul, London. 1964.

Author Information

Mark Lamarre
U. S. A.

Jules Henri Poincaré (1854—1912)

poincare_henriPoincaré was an influential French philosopher of science and mathematics, as well as a distinguished scientist and mathematician. In the foundations of mathematics he argued for conventionalism, against formalism, against logicism, and against Cantor's treating his new infinite sets as being independent of human thinking. Poincaré stressed the essential role of intuition in a proper constructive foundation for mathematics. He believed that logic was a system of analytic truths, whereas arithmetic was synthetic and a priori, in Kant's sense of these terms. Mathematicians can use the methods of logic to check a proof, but they must use intuition to create a proof, he believed.

He maintained that non-Euclidean geometries are just as legitimate as Euclidean geometry, because all geometries are conventions or "disguised" definitions. Although all geometries are about physical space, a choice of one geometry over others is a matter of economy and simplicity, not a matter of finding the true one among the false ones.

For Poincaré, the aim of science is prediction rather than, say, explanation. Although every scientific theory has its own language or syntax, which is chosen by convention, it is not a matter of convention whether scientific predictions agree with the facts. For example, it is a matter of convention whether to define gravitation as following Newton's theory of gravitation, but it is not a matter of convention as to whether gravitation is a force that acts on celestial bodies, or is the only force that does so. So, Poincaré believed that scientific laws are conventions but not arbitrary conventions.

Poincaré had an especially interesting view of scientific induction. Laws, he said, are not direct generalizations of experience; they aren't mere summaries of the points on the graph. Rather, the scientist declares the law to be some interpolated curve that is more or less smooth and so will miss some of those points. Thus a scientific theory is not directly falsifiable by the data of experience; instead, the falsification process is more indirect.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Chaos and the Solar System
  3. Arithmetic, Intuition and Logic
  4. Conventionalism and the Philosophy of Geometry
  5. Science and Hypothesis
  6. Bibliography

1. Life

Poincaré was born on April 29,1854 in Nancy and died on July 17, 1912 in Paris. Poincaré's family was influential. His cousin Raymond was the President and the Prime Minister of France, and his father Leon was a professor of medicine at the University of Nancy. His sister Aline married the spiritualist philosopher Emile Boutroux.

Poincaré studied mining engineering, mathematics and physics in Paris. Beginning in 1881, he taught at the University of Paris. There he held the chairs of Physical and Experimental Mechanics, Mathematical Physics and Theory of Probability, and Celestial Mechanics and Astronomy.

At the beginning of his scientific career, in his doctoral dissertation of1879, Poincaré devised a new way of studying the properties of functions defined by differential equations. He not only faced the question of determining the integral of such equations, but also was the first person to study the general geometric properties of these functions. He clearly saw that this method was useful in the solution of problems such as the stability of the solar system, in which the question is about the qualitative properties of planetary orbits (for example, are orbits regular or chaotic?) and not about the numerical solution of gravitational equations. During his studies on differential equations, Poincaré made use of Lobachevsky's non-Euclidean geometry. Later, Poincaré applied to celestial mechanics the methods he had introduced in his doctoral dissertation. His research on the stability of the solar system opened the door to the study of chaotic deterministic systems; and the methods he used gave rise to algebraic topology.

Poincaré sketched a preliminary version of the special theory of relativity and stated that the velocity of light is a limit velocity and that mass depends on speed. He formulated the principle of relativity, according to which no mechanical or electromagnetic experiment can discriminate between a state of uniform motion and a state of rest, and he derived the Lorentz transformation. His fundamental theorem that every isolated mechanical system returns after a finite time [the Poincaré Recurrence Time] to its initial state is the source of many philosophical and scientific analyses on entropy. Finally, he clearly understood how radical is quantum theory's departure from classical physics.

Poincaré was deeply interested in the philosophy of science and the foundations of mathematics. He argued for conventionalism and against both formalism and logicism. Cantor's set theory was also an object of his criticism. He wrote several articles on the philosophical interpretation of mathematical logic. During his life, he published three books on the philosophy of science and mathematics. A fourth book was published posthumously in 1913.

2. Chaos and the Solar System

In his research on the three-body problem, Poincaré became the first person to discover a chaotic deterministic system. Given the law of gravity and the initial positions and velocities of the only three bodies in all of space, the subsequent positions and velocities are fixed--so the three-body system is deterministic. However, Poincaré found that the evolution of such a system is often chaotic in the sense that a small perturbation in the initial state such as a slight change in one body's initial position might lead to a radically different later state than would be produced by the unperturbed system. If the slight change isn't detectable by our measuring instruments, then we won't be able to predict which final state will occur. So, Poincaré's research proved that the problem of determinism and the problem of predictability are distinct problems.

From a philosophical point of view, Poincaré's results did not receive the attention that they deserved. Also the scientific line of research that Poincaré opened was neglected until meteorologist Edward Lorenz, in 1963, rediscovered a chaotic deterministic system while he was studying the evolution of a simple model of the atmosphere. Earlier, Poincaré had suggested that the difficulties of reliable weather predicting are due to the intrinsic chaotic behavior of the atmosphere. Another interesting aspect of Poincaré's study is the real nature of the distribution in phase space of stable and unstable points, which are so mixed that he did not try to make a picture of their arrangement. Now we know that the shape of such distribution is fractal-like. However, the scientific study of fractals did not begin until Benoit Mandelbrot's work in 1975, a century after Poincaré's first insight.

Why was Poincaré's research neglected and underestimated? The problem is interesting because Poincaré was awarded an important scientific prize for his research; and his research in celestial mechanics was recognized to be of fundamental importance. Probably there were two causes. Scientists and philosophers were primarily interested in the revolutionary new physics of relativity and quantum mechanics, but Poincaré worked with classical mechanics. Also, the behavior of a chaotic deterministic system can be described only by means of a numerical solution whose complexity is staggering. Without the help of a computer the task is almost hopeless.

3. Arithmetic, Intuition and Logic

Logicists such as Bertrand Russell and Gottlob Frege believed that mathematics is basically a branch of symbolic logic, because they supposed that mathematical terminology can be defined using only the terminology of logic and because, after this translation of terms, any mathematical theorem can be shown to be a restatement of a theorem of logic. Poincaré objected to this logicist program. He was an intuitionist who stressed the essential role of human intuition in the foundations of mathematics. According to Poincaré, a definition of a mathematical entity is not the exposition of the essential properties of the entity, but it is the construction of the entity itself; in other words, a legitimate mathematical definition creates and justifies its object. For Poincaré, arithmetic is a synthetic science whose objects are not independent from human thought.

Poincaré made this point in his investigation of Peano's axiomatization of arithmetic. Italian mathematician Giuseppe Peano (1858-1932) axiomatized the mathematical theory of natural numbers. This is the arithmetic of the nonnegative integers. Apart from some purely logical principles, Peano employed five mathematical axioms. Informally, these axioms are:

  1. Zero is a natural number.
  2. Zero is not the successor of any natural number.
  3. Every natural number has a successor, which is a natural number.
  4. If the successor of natural number a is equal to the successor of natural number b, then a and b are equal.
  5. Suppose:
    (i) zero has a property P;
    (ii) if every natural number less than a has the property P then a also has the property P.
    Then every natural number has the property P. (This is the principle of complete induction.)

Bertrand Russell said Peano's axioms constitute an implicit definition of natural numbers, but Poincaré said they do only if they can be demonstrated to be consistent. They can be shown consistent only by showing there is some object satisfying these axioms. From a general point of view, an axiom system can be conceived of as an implicit definition only if it is possible to prove the existence of at least one object that satisfies all the axioms. Proving this is not an easy task, for the number of consequences of Peano axioms is infinite and so a direct inspection of each consequence is not possible. Only one way seems adequate: we must verify that if the premises of an inference in the system are consistent with the axioms of logic, then so is the conclusion. Therefore, if after n inferences no contradiction is produced, then after n+1 inferences no contradiction will be either. Poincaré argues that this reasoning is a vicious circle, for it relies upon the principle of complete induction, whose consistency we have to prove. (In 1936, Gerhard Gentzen proved the consistency of Peano axioms, but his proof required the use of a limited form of transfinite induction whose own consistency is in doubt.) As a consequence, Poincaré asserts that if we can't noncircularly establish the consistency of Peano's axioms, then the principle of complete induction is surely not provable by means of general logical laws; thus it is not analytic, but it is a synthetic judgment, and logicism is refuted. It is evident that Poincaré supports Kant's epistemological viewpoint on arithmetic. For Poincaré, the principle of complete induction, which is not provable via analytical inferences, is a genuine synthetic a priori judgment. Hence arithmetic cannot be reduced to logic; the latter is analytic, while arithmetic is synthetic.

The synthetic character of arithmetic is also evident if we consider the nature of mathematical reasoning. Poincaré suggests a distinction between two different kinds of mathematical inference: verification and proof. Verification or proof-check is a sort of mechanical reasoning, while proof-creation is a fecund inference. For example, the statement "2+2 = 4" is verifiable because it is possible to demonstrate its truth with the help of logical laws and the definition of sum; it is an analytical statement that admits a straightforward verification. On the contrary, the general statement (the commutative law of addition)

For any natural numbers x and y, x + y = y + x

is not directly verifiable. We can choose an arbitrary pair of natural numbers a and b, and we can verify that a+b = b+a; but there is an infinite number of admissible choices of pairs, so the verification is always incomplete. In other words, the verification of the commutative law is an analytical method by means of which we can verify every particular instance of a general theorem, but the proof of the theorem itself is synthetic reasoning which really extends our knowledge, Poincaré believed.

Another aspect of mathematical thinking that Poincaré analyzes is the different roles played by intuition and logic. Methods of formal logic are elementary and certain, and we can surely rely on them. However, logic does not teach us how to build a proof. It is intuition that helps mathematicians find the correct way of to assemble basic inferences into a useful proof. Poincaré offers the following example. An unskilled chess player who watches a game can verify whether a move is legal, but he does not understand why players move certain pieces, for he does not see the plan which guides players' choices. In a similar way, a mathematician who uses only logical methods can verify every inference in a given proof, but he cannot find an original proof. In other words, every elementary inference in a proof is easily verifiable through formal logic, but the invention of a proof requires the understanding -- grasped by intuition -- of the general scheme, which directs mathematician's efforts towards the final goal.

Logic is -- according to Poincaré -- the study of properties which are common to all classifications. There are two different kinds of classifications: predicative classifications, which are not modified by the introduction of new elements; and impredicative classifications, which are modified by new elements. Definitions as well as classifications are divided into predicative and impredicative. A set is defined by a law according to which every element is generated. In the case of an infinite set, the process of generating elements is unfinished; thus there are always new elements. If their introduction changes the classification of already generated objects, then the definition is impredicative. For example, look at phrases containing a finite number of words and defining a point of space. These phrases are arranged in alphabetical order and each of them is associated with a natural number: the first is associated with number 1, the second with 2, etc. Hence every point defined by such phrases is associated with a natural number. Now suppose that a new point is defined by a new phrase. To determine the corresponding number it is necessary to insert this phrase in alphabetical order; but such an operation modifies the number associated with the already classified points whose defining phrase follows, in alphabetical order, the new phrase. Thus this new definition is impredicative.

For Poincaré, impredicative definitions are the source of antinomies in set theory, and the prohibition of impredicative definitions will remove such antinomies. To this end, Poincaré enunciates the vicious circle principle: a thing cannot be defined with respect to a collection that presupposes the thing itself. In other words, in a definition of an object, one cannot use a set to which the object belongs, because doing so produces an impredicative definition. Poincaré attributes the vicious circle principle to a French mathematician J. Richard. In 1905, Richard discovered a new paradox in set theory, and he offered a tentative solution based on the vicious circle principle.

Poincaré's prohibition of impredicative definitions is also connected with his point of view on infinity. According to Poincaré, there are two different schools of thought about infinite sets; he called these schools Cantorian and Pragmatist. Cantorians are realists with respect to mathematical entities; these entities have a reality that is independent of human conceptions. The mathematician discovers them but does not create them. Pragmatists believe that a thing exists only when it is the object of an act of thinking, and infinity is nothing but the possibility of the mind's generating an endless series of finite objects. Practicing mathematicians tend to be realists, not pragmatists or intuitionists. This dispute is not about the role of impredicative definitions in producing antinomies, but about the independence of mathematical entities from human thinking.

4. Conventionalism and the Philosophy of Geometry

The discovery of non-Euclidean geometries upset the commonly accepted Kantian viewpoint that the true structure of space can be known apriori. To understand Poincaré's point of view on the foundation of geometry, it helps to remember that, during his research on functions defined by differential equations, he actually used non-Euclidean geometry. He found that several geometric properties are easily provable by means of Lobachevsky geometry, while their proof is not straightforward in Euclidean geometry. Also, Poincaré knew Beltrami's research on Lobachevsky's geometry. Beltrami (Italian mathematician, 1835-1899) proved the consistency of Lobachevsky geometry with respect to Euclidean geometry, by means of a translation of every term of Lobachevsky geometry into a term of Euclidean geometry. The translation is carefully chosen so that every axiom of non-Euclidean geometry is translated into a theorem of Euclidean geometry. Beltrami's translation and Poincaré's study of functions led Poincaré to assert that:

  • Non-Euclidean geometries have the same logical and mathematical legitimacy as Euclidean geometry.
  • All geometric systems are equivalent and thus no system of axioms may claim that it is the true geometry.
  • Axioms of geometry are neither synthetic a priori judgments nor analytic ones; they are conventions or 'disguised' definitions.

According to Poincaré, all geometric systems deal with the same properties of space, although each of them employs its own language, whose syntax is defined by the set of axioms. In other words, geometries differ in their language, but they are concerned with the same reality, for a geometry can be translated into another geometry. There is only one criterion according to which we can select a geometry, namely a criterion of economy and simplicity. This is the very reason why we commonly use Euclidean geometry: it is the simplest. However, with respect to a specific problem, non-Euclidean geometry may give us the result with less effort. In 1915, Albert Einstein found it more convenient, the conventionalist would say, to develop his theory of general relativity using non-Euclidean rather than Euclidean geometry. Poincaré's realist opponent would disagree and say that Einstein discovered space to be non-Euclidean.

Poincaré's treatment of geometry is applicable also to the general analysis of scientific theories. Every scientific theory has its own language, which is chosen by convention. However, in spite of this freedom, the agreement or disagreement between predictions and facts is not conventional but is substantial and objective. Science has an objective validity. It is not due to chance or to freedom of choice that scientific predictions are often accurate.

These considerations clarify Poincaré's conventionalism. There is an objective criterion, independent of the scientist's will, according to which it is possible to judge the soundness of the scientific theory, namely the accuracy of its predictions. Thus the principles of science are not set by an arbitrary convention. In so far as scientific predictions are true, science gives us objective, although incomplete, knowledge. The freedom of a scientist takes place in the choice of language, axioms, and the facts that deserve attention.

However, according to Poincaré, every scientific law can be analyzed into two parts, namely a principle, that is a conventional truth, and an empirical law. The following example is due to Poincaré. The law:

Celestial bodies obey Newton's law of gravitation

The law consists of two elements:

  1. Gravitation follows Newton law.
  2. Gravitation is the only force that acts on celestial bodies.

We can regard the first statement as a principle, as a convention; thus it becomes the definition of gravitation. But then the second statement is an empirical law.

Poincaré's attitude towards conventionalism is illustrated by the following statement, which concluded his analysis on classical mechanics in Science and Hypothesis:

Are the laws of acceleration and composition of forces nothing but arbitrary conventions? Conventions, yes; arbitrary, no; they would seem arbitrary if we forgot the experiences which guided the founders of science to their adoption and which are, although imperfect, sufficient to justify them. Sometimes it is useful to turn our attention to the experimental origin of these conventions.

5. Science and Hypothesis

According to Poincaré, although scientific theories originate from experience, they are neither verifiable nor falsifiable by means of the experience alone. For example, look at the problem of finding a mathematical law that describes a given series of observations. In this case, representative points are plotted in a graph, and then a simple curve is interpolated. The curve chosen will depend both on the experience which determines the representative points and on the desired smoothness of the curve even though the smoother the curve the more that some points will miss the curve. Therefore, the interpolated curve -- and thus the tentative law -- is not a direct generalization of the experience, for it 'corrects' the experience. The discrepancy between observed and calculated values is thus not regarded as a falsification of the law, but as a correction that the law imposes on our observations. In this sense, there is always a necessary difference between facts and theories, and therefore a scientific theory is not directly falsifiable by the experience.

For Poincaré, the aim of the science is to prediction. To accomplish this task, science makes use of generalizations that go beyond the experience. In fact, scientific theories are hypotheses. But every hypothesis has to be continually tested. And when it fails in an empirical test, it must be given up. According to Poincaré, a scientific hypothesis which was proved untenable can still be very useful. If a hypothesis does not pass an empirical test, then this fact means that we have neglected some important and meaningful element; thus the hypothesis gives us the opportunity to discover the existence of an unforeseen aspect of reality. As a consequence of this point of view about the nature of scientific theories, Poincaré suggests that a scientist must utilize few hypotheses, for it is very difficult to find the wrong hypothesis in a theory which makes use of many hypotheses.

For Poincaré, there are many kinds of hypotheses:

  • Hypotheses which have the maximum scope, and which are common to all scientific theories (for example, the hypothesis according to which the influence of remote bodies is negligible). Such hypotheses are the last to be changed.
  • Indifferent hypotheses that, in spite of their auxiliary role in scientific theories, have no objective content (for example, the hypothesis that unseen atoms exist).
  • Generalizations, which are subjected to empirical control; they are the true scientific hypotheses.

Regarding Poincaré's point of view about scientific theories, the following have the most lasting value:

  • Every scientific theory is a hypothesis that had to be tested.
  • Experience suggests scientific theories; but experience does not justify them.
  • Experience alone is unable to falsify a theory, for the theory often corrects the experience.
  • A central aim of science is prediction.
  • The role of a falsified hypothesis is very important, for it throws light on unforeseen conditions.
  • Experience is judged according to a theory.

6. Bibliography


  • Oeuvres, 11 volumes, Paris : Gauthier-Villars, 1916-1956


  • 1902 La science et l'hypothèse, Paris : Flammarion (Science and hypothesis, 1905)
  • 1905 La valeur de la science, Paris : Flammarion (The value of science, 1907)
  • 1908 Science and méthode, Paris : Flammarion (Science and method, 1914)
  • 1913 Dernières pensées, Paris : Flammarion (Mathematics and science: last essays, 1963)
  • The first three works are translated in The foundations of science, Washington, D.C. : University Press of America, 1982 (first edition 1946).


  • Les méthods nouvelles de la mécanique céleste, Paris : Gauthier-Villars, 1892 vol. I , 1893 vol. II, 1899 vol. III (New methods of celestial mechanics, American Institute of Physics, 1993)
  • Lecons de mécanique céleste, Paris : Gauthier-Villars, 1905 vol. I, 1907 vol. II part I, 1909 vol. II part II, 1911 vol. III


  • Le livre du centenaire de la naissance de Henri Poincaré, Paris : Gauthier-Villars, 1955
  • The mathematical heritage of Henri Poincaré, (edited by Felix E. Browder) Providence, R.I. : American Mathematical Society, 1983 [Symposium on the Mathematical Heritage of Henri Poincaré (1980 : Indiana University, Bloomington)]
  • Henri Poincaré: Science et philosophie. Congrès international : Nancy, France, 1994, edited by Jean-Louis Greffe, Gerhard Heinzmann, Kuno Lorenz, Berlin : Akademie Verlag, 1996 ; Paris : A. Blanchard, 1996
  • Appel, Paul, Henri Poincaré, Paris : Plon, 1925
  • Bartocci, Claudio, "Equazioni e orbite celesti: gli albori della dinamica topologica" in Henri Poincaré. Geometria e caso, Torino : Bollati Boringhieri, 1995
  • Barrow-Green, June, Poincaré and the three body problem, Providence, RI : American Mathematical Society ; London : London Mathematical Society, 1997
  • Dantzig, Tobias, Henri Poincaré. Critic of crisis: reflections on his universe of discourse, New York : Scriber, 1954
  • Folina, Janet, Poincaré and the philosophy of mathematics, London : Macmillan, 1992 ; New York : St. Martin's Press, 1992
  • Giedymin, Jerzy, Science and convention. Essay on Henri Poincaré's philosophy of science and the conventionalist tradition, Oxford : Pergamon Press, 1982
  • Heinzmann, Gerhard, Entre intuition et analyse : Poincaré et le concept de prédicativité, Paris : A. Blanchard, 1985
  • Heinzmann, Gerhard, Zwischen Objektkonstruktion und Strukturanalyse. Zur Philosophie der Mathematik bei Poincaré, Vandenhoek & Ruprecht, 1995
  • de Lorenzo, Javier, La filosofia de la matematica de Jules Henri Poincaré, Madrid : Editorial Tecnos, 1974
  • Mette, Corinna, Invariantentheorie als Grundlage des Konventionalismus : Uberlegungen zur Wissenschaftstheorie von Poincaré , Essen : Die Blaue Eule, 1986, Essen, 1986
  • Mooij, Jan, La philosophie des mathématiques de Henri Poincaré, Paris : Gauthier-Villars, 1966
  • Parrini, Paolo, Empirismo logico e convenzionalismo, Milano : Franco Angeli, 1983
  • Rougier, Luis, La philosophie géométrique de Henri Poincaré, Paris : Alcan, 1920
  • Schmid, Anne-Francoise, Une philosophie de savant : Henri Poincaré et la logique mathématique, Paris : F. Maspero, 1978.
  • Torretti, Roberto, Philosophy of geometry from Riemann to Poincaré, Dordrecth : D. Reidel Pub. Co., 1978

Author Information

Mauro Murzi

Philo of Alexandria (c. 20 B.C.E.—40 C.E.)

Philo_of_AlexandriaPhilo of Alexandria, a Hellenized Jew also called Judaeus Philo, is a figure that spans two cultures, the Greek and the Hebrew. When Hebrew mythical thought met Greek philosophical thought in the first century B.C.E. it was only natural that someone would try to develop speculative and philosophical justification for Judaism in terms of Greek philosophy. Thus Philo produced a synthesis of both traditions developing concepts for future Hellenistic interpretation of messianic Hebrew thought, especially by Clement of Alexandria, Christian Apologists like Athenagoras, Theophilus, Justin Martyr, Tertullian, and by Origen. He may have influenced Paul, his contemporary, and perhaps the authors of the Gospel of John (C. H. Dodd) and the Epistle to the Hebrews (R. Williamson and H. W. Attridge). In the process, he laid the foundations for the development of Christianity in the West and in the East, as we know it today. Philo's primary importance is in the development of the philosophical and theological foundations of Christianity. The church preserved the Philonic writings because Eusebius of Caesarea labeled the monastic ascetic group of Therapeutae and Therapeutrides, described in Philo's The Contemplative Life, as Christians, which is highly unlikely. Eusebius also promoted the legend that Philo met Peter in Rome. Jerome (345-420 C.E.) even lists him as a church Father. Jewish tradition was uninterested in philosophical speculation and did not preserve Philo's thought. According to H. A. Wolfson, Philo was a founder of religious philosophy, a new habit of practicing philosophy. Philo was thoroughly educated in Greek philosophy and culture as can be seen from his superb knowledge of classical Greek literature. He had a deep reverence for Plato and referred to him as "the most holy Plato" (Prob. 13). Philo's philosophy represented contemporary Platonism which was its revised version incorporating Stoic doctrine and terminology via Antiochus of Ascalon (ca 90 B.C.E.) and Eudorus of Alexandria, as well as elements of Aristotelian logic and ethics and Pythagorean ideas. Clement of Alexandria even called Philo "the Pythagorean."  But it seems that Philo also picked up his ancestral tradition, though as an adult, and once having discovered it, he put forward the teachings of the Jewish prophet, Moses, as "the summit of philosophy" (Op. 8), and considered Moses the teacher of Pythagoras (b. ca 570 B.C.E.) and of all Greek philosophers and lawgivers (Hesiod, Heraclitus, Lycurgus, to mention a few). For Philo, Greek philosophy was a natural development of the revelatory teachings of Moses. He was no innovator in this matter because already before him Jewish scholars attempted the same. Artapanus in the second century B.C.E identified Moses with Musaeus and with Orpheus. According to Aristobulus of Paneas (first half of the second century B.C.E.), Homer and Hesiod drew from the books of Moses which were translated into Greek long before the Septuagint.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Philo's Works and Their Classification
  3. Technique of Exposition
  4. Emphasis on Contemplative Life and Philosophy
  5. Philosophy and Wisdom: a Path to Ethical Life
  6. Philo's Ethical Doctrine
  7. Philo's Mysticism and Transcendence of God
  8. Source of Intuition of the Infinite Reality
  9. Philo's Doctrine of Creation
    1. Philo's Model of Creation
    2. Eternal Creation
  10. Doctrine of Miracles: Naturalism and Comprehension
  11. Doctrine of the Logos in Philo's Writings
    1. The Utterance of God
    2. The Divine Mind
    3. God's Transcendent Power
    4. First-born Son of God
    5. Universal Bond: in the Physical World and in the Human Soul
    6. Immanent Reason
    7. Immanent Mediator of the Physical Universe
    8. The Angel of the Lord, Revealer of God
    9. Multi-Named Archetype
    10. Soul-Nourishing Manna and Wisdom
    11. Intermediary Power
    12. "God"
    13. Summary of Philo's Concept of the Logos
  12. List of abbreviations to Philo's works
  13. Editions of Philo's works and their translations
  14. Major Works on Philo

1. Life

Very little is known about the life of Philo. He lived in Alexandria, which at that time counted, according to some estimates, about one million people and included largest Jewish community outside of Palestine. He came from a wealthy and the prominent family and appears to be a leader in his community. Once he visited Jerusalem and the temple, as he himself stated in Prov. 2.64. Philo's brother, Alexander, was a wealthy, prominent Roman government official, a custom agent responsible for collecting dues on all goods imported into Egypt from the East. He donated money to plate the gates of the temple in Jerusalem with gold and silver. He also made a loan to Herod Agrippa I, grandson of Herod the Great.  Alexander's two sons, Marcus and Tiberius Julius Alexander were involved in Roman affairs. Marcus married Bernice,  the daughter of Herod Agrippa I, who is mentioned in Acts (25:13, 23; 26:30). The other son, Tiberius Julius Alexander, described by Josephus as "not remaining true to his ancestral practices" became procurator of the province of Judea (46-48 C.E.) and prefect of Egypt (66-70 C.E.). Philo was involved in the affairs of his community which interrupted his contemplative life (Spec. leg. 3.1-6), especially during the crisis relating to the pogrom which was initiated in 38 C.E. by the prefect Flaccus, during the reign of emperor Gaius Caligula. He was elected to head the Jewish delegation, which apparently included his brother Alexander and nephew Tiberius Julius Alexander, and was sent to Rome in 39-40 B.C.E. to see the emperor. He reported the events in his writings Against Flaccus and The Embassy to Gaius.

2. Philo's Works and Their Classification

The major part of Philo's writings consists of philosophical essays dealing with the main themes of biblical thought that present a systematic and precise exposition of his views. One has the impression that he attempted to show that the philosophical Platonic or Stoic ideas were nothing but the deductions made from the biblical verses of Moses. Philo was not an original thinker, but he was well acquainted with the entire range of Greek philosophical traditions through the original texts. If there are gaps in his knowledge, they are rather in his Jewish tradition as evidenced by his relying on the Greek translation of the Hebrew Bible. In his attempt to reconcile the Greek way of thinking with his Hebrew tradition he had antecedents such as Pseudo-Aristeas and Aristobulus.

Philo's works are divided into three categories:

1. The first group comprises writings that paraphrase the biblical texts of Moses: On Abraham, On the Decalogue, On Joseph, The Life of Moses, On the Creation of the World, On Rewards and Punishments, On the Special Laws, On the Virtues. A series of works include allegorical explanations of Genesis 2-41: On Husbandry, On the Cherubim, On the Confusion of Tongues, On the Preliminary Studies, The Worse Attacks the Better, On Drunkenness, On Flight and Finding, On the Giants, Allegorical Interpretation (Allegory of the Law), On the Migration of Abraham, On the Change of Names, On Noah's Work as a Planter, On the Posterity and Exile of Cain, Who is the Heir, On the Unchangeableness of God, On the Sacrifices of Abel and Cain, On Sobriety, On Dreams. Here belong also: Questions and Answers on Genesis and Questions and Answers on Exodus (aside from fragments preserved only in Armenian).

2. A series of works classified as philosophical treatises: Every Good Man is Free (a sequel of which had the theme that every bad man is a slave, which did not survive); On the Eternity of the World; On Providence (except for lengthy fragments preserved in Armenian); Alexander or On Whether Brute Animals Possess Reason (preserved only in Armenian) and called in Latin De Animalibus (On the Animals); a brief fragment De Deo (On God), preserved only in Armenian is an exegesis of Genesis 18, and belongs to the Allegory of the Law.

3. The third group includes historical-apologetic writings: Hypothetica or Apologia Pro Judaeos which survives only in two Greek extracts quoted by Eusebius. The first extract is a rationalistic version of Exodus giving a eulogic account of Moses and a summary of Mosaic constitution contrasting its severity with the laxity of the gentile laws; the second extract describes the Essenes. The other apologetic essays include Against Flaccus, The Embassy to Gaius, and On the Contemplative Life. But all these works are related to Philo's explanations of the texts of Moses.

3. Technique of Exposition

Philo uses an allegorical technique for interpretation of the Hebrew myth and in this he follows the Greek tradition of Theagenes of Rhegium (second half of the sixth century B.C.E.). Theagenes used this approach in defense of Homer's theology against the detractors. He said that the myths of gods struggling with each other referred to the opposition between the elements; the names of gods were made to refer to various dispositions of the soul, e.g., Athena was reflection, Aphrodite, desire, Hermes, elocution. Anaxagoras, too, explained the Homeric poems as discussions of virtue and justice. The Sophist Prodicus of Ceos (b. 470 B.C.E.), contemporary of Socrates, interpreted the gods of Homeric stories as personifications of those natural substances that are useful to human life [e.g., bread and Demeter, wine and Dionysus, water and Poseidon, fire and Hephaestus].  He also employed ethical allegory. His treatise, The Seasons, contains a Parable of Heracles, paraphrased in Xenophon's Memorabilia (2.1.21-34), which tells the story of Heracles who, at crossroad, was attracted by Virtue and Vice in the form of two women of great stature (Sacr. 20-44). The allegory was used by the cynic Antisthenes (contemporary of Plato) and Diogenes the Cynic.  Stoics expanded the Cynics' use of Homeric allegory in the interest of their philosophical system. Using this allegorical method, Philo seeks out the hidden message beneath the surface of any particular text and tries to read back a new doctrine into the work of the past. In a similar way Plutarch allegorized the ancient Egyptian mythology giving it a new meaning. But in some aspects of Jewish life Philo defends the literal interpretation of his tradition as in the debate on circumcision or the Sabbath (Mig. 89-93; Spec. leg. 1.1-11). Though he acknowledges the symbolic meaning of these rituals, he insists on their literal interpretation.

4. Emphasis on Contemplative Life and Philosophy

The key emphasis in Philo's philosophy is contrasting the spiritual life, understood as intellectual contemplation, with the mundane preoccupation with earthly concerns, either as an active life or as a search for pleasure. Philo disdained the material world and physical body (Spec. leg. 3.1-6). The body was for Philo as for Plato,  "an evil and a dead thing" (LA 3.72-74; Gig. 15), wicked by nature and a plotter against the soul (LA 3.69). But it was a necessary evil, hence Philo does not advocate a complete abnegation from life. On the contrary he advocates fulfilling first the practical obligations toward men and the use of mundane possessions for the accomplishment of praiseworthy works (Fug. 23-28; Plant. 167-168). Similarly he considers pleasure indispensable and wealth useful, but for a virtuous man they are not a perfect good (LA 3.69-72). He believed that men should steer themselves away from the physical aspect of things gradually. Some people, like philosophers, may succeed in focusing their minds on the eternal realities. Philo believed that man's final goal and ultimate bliss is in the "knowledge of the true and living God" (Decal. 81; Abr. 58; Praem. 14); "such knowledge is the boundary of happiness and blessedness" (Det. 86). To him, mystic vision allows our soul to see the Divine Logos (Ebr. 152) and achieve a union with God (Deut. 30:19-20; Post. 12). In a desire to validate the scripture as an inspired writing, he often compares it to prophetic ecstasy (Her. 69-70). His praise of the contemplative life of the monastic Therapeutae in Alexandria attests to his preference of bios theoreticos over bios practicos. He adheres to the Platonic picture of the souls descending into the material realm and that only the souls of philosophers are able to come to the surface and return to their realm in heaven (Gig. 12-15). Philo adopted the Platonic concept of the soul with its tripartite division. The rational part of the soul, however, is breathed into man as a part of God's substance. Philo speaks figuratively  "Now, when we are alive, we are so though our soul is dead and buried in our body, as if in a tomb. But if it were to die, then our soul would live according to its proper life being released from the evil and dead body to which it is bound" (Op. 67-69; LA 1.108).

5. Philosophy and Wisdom: a Path to Ethical Life

Philo differentiated between philosophy and wisdom.  To him philosophy is "the greatest good thing to men" (Op. 53-54), which they acquired because of a gift of reason from God (Op. 77). It is a devotion to wisdom, and a way to acquire the highest knowledge, "an attentive study of wisdom." Wisdom in turn is "the knowledge of all divine and human things, and of the respective causes of them" that is, according to Philo, contained in the Torah (Congr. 79). Hence it follows that Moses, as the author of the Torah, "had reached the very summit of philosophy" and "had learnt from the oracles of God the most numerous and important of the principles of nature" (Op. 8). Moses was also the interpreter of nature (Her. 213). By saying this Philo wanted to indicate that human wisdom has two origins: one is divine, the other is natural (Her. 182). Moreover, that Mosaic Law is not inconsistent with nature. A single law, the Logos of nature governs the entire world (Jos. 28-31) and its law is imprinted on the human mind (Prob. 46-47). Because of this we have a conscience that affects even wicked persons (QG 4.62). Wisdom is a consummated philosophy and as such has to be in agreement with the principles of nature (Mos. 2.48; Abr. 16; Op. 143; Spec. leg. 2.13; 3.46-47, 112, 137; Virt. 18). The study of philosophy has as its end "life in accordance with nature" and following the "path of right reason" (Mig. 128). Philosophy prepares us to a moral life, i.e., "to live in conformity with nature" (Prob. 160). From this follows that life in accordance with nature hastens us towards virtues (Mos. 2. 181; Abr. 60, Spec. leg. 1.155), and an unjust man is the one "who transgresses the ordinances of nature" (Spec. leg. 4.204; Cf. Decal. 132; Virt. 131-132; Plant. 49; Ebr. 142; Agr. 66). Thus Philo does not discount human reason, but contrasts only the true doctrine which is trust in God with uncertain, plausible, and unreliable reasoning (LA 3.228-229).

6. Philo's Ethical Doctrine

Philo's ethical doctrine is Stoic in its essence and includes the active effort to achieve virtue, the model of a sage to be followed, and practical advice concerning the achievement of the proper right reason and a proper emotional state of rational emotions (eupatheia). To Philo man is basically passive and it is God who sows noble qualities in the soul, thus we are instruments of God (LA 2.31-32; Cher. 127-128). Still man is the only creature endowed with freedom to act though his freedom is limited by the constitution of his mind. As such he is responsible for his action and "very properly receives blame for the offences which he designedly commits." This is so because he received a faculty of voluntary motion and is free from the dominion of necessity (Deus 47-48). Philo advocates the practice of virtue in both the divine and the human spheres. Lovers only of God and lovers only of men are both incomplete in virtue. Philo advocates a middle harmonious way (Decal. 106-110; Spec. leg. 4. 102). He differentiates four virtues: wisdom, self-control, courage, and justice (LA 1.63-64). Human dispositions Philo divides into three groups – the best is given the vision of God, the next has a vision on the right i.e., the Beneficent or Creative Power whose name is God, and the third has a vision on the left, i.e., the Ruling Power called Lord (Abr. 119-130). Felicity is achieved in the culmination of three values: the spiritual, the corporeal, and the external (QG 3.16). Philo adopts the Stoic wise man as a model for human behavior. Such a wise man should imitate God who was impassible (apathes) hence the sage should achieve a state of apatheia, i.e., he should be free of irrational emotions (passions), pleasure, desire, sorrow, and fear, and should replace them by rational or well-reasoned emotions (eupatheia), joy, will, compunction, and caution. In such a state of eupatheia, the sage achieves a serene, stable, and joyful disposition in which he is directed by reason in his decisions (QG 2.57; Abr. 201-204; Fug. 166-167; Mig. 67). But at the same time Philo claims that the needs of the body should not be neglected and rejects the other extreme, i.e., the practice of austerities. Everything should be governed by reason, self-control, and moderation. Joy and pleasure do not have intrinsic values, but are by-products of virtue and characterize the sage (Fug. 25-34; Det. 124-125; LA 80).

7. Philo's Mysticism and Transcendence of God

Mysticism is a doctrine that maintains that one can gain knowledge of reality that is not accessible to sense perception or to reason. It is usually associated with some mental and physical training and in the theistic version it involves a sensation of closeness to or unity with God experienced as temporal and spatial transcendence. According to Philo, man's highest union with God is limited to God's manifestation as the Logos. It is similar to a later doctrine of intellectual contact of our human intellect with the transcendent intellect developed by Alexander of Aphrodisias and Ibn Rushd and different from the Plotinian doctrine of the absorption into the ineffable one. The notion of the utter transcendence of the First Principle probably goes back as far as Anaximander who postulated the Indefinite (apeiron) as this Principle (arche) and could be found in Plato's concept of the Good,  but the formulation is accredited to Speusippus, the successor of Plato in the Academy.  Philo's biblical tradition in which one could not name or describe God was the major factor in accepting the Greek Platonic concepts and emphasis on God's transcendence. But this position is rather alien to biblical and rabbinical understanding. In the Bible, God is represented in a "material" and "physical" way. Philosophically, however, Philo differentiated between the existence of God, which could be demonstrated, and the nature of God which humans are not able to cognize. God's essence is beyond any human experience or cognition, therefore it can be described only by stating what God is not (via negativa) or by depriving him of any attribute of sensible objects and putting God beyond any attribute applicable to a sensible world (via eminentiae) because God alone is a being whose existence is his essence (Det. 160). Philo states in many places that God's essence is one and single, that he does not belong to any class or that there is in God any distinction of genus and species. Therefore, we cannot say anything about his qualities "For God is not only devoid of peculiar qualities, but he is likewise not of the form of man" (LA 1.36); he "is free from distinctive qualities" (LA 1.51; 3.36; Deus 55). Strictly speaking, we cannot make any positive or negative statements about God: "Who can venture to affirm that ... he is a body, or that he is incorporeal, or that he has such and such distinctive qualities, or that he has no such qualities? ... But he alone can utter a positive assertion respecting himself, since he alone has an accurate knowledge of his own nature" (LA 3.206). Moreover, since the essence of God is single, therefore its property must be one which Philo denotes as acting "Now it is an especial attribute of God to create, and this faculty it is impious to ascribe to any created being" (Cher. 77). The expression of this act of God, which is at the same time his thinking, is his Logos (Prov. 1.7; Sacr. 65; Mos. 1.283). Though God is hidden, his reality is made manifest by the Logos that is God's image (Somn. 1.239; Conf. 147-148) and by the sensible universe, which in turn is the image of the Logos, that is "the archetypal model, the idea of ideas" (Op. 25). Because of this we can perceive God's existence, though we cannot fathom his essence. But there are degrees and levels to our cognizance of God. Those at the summit and the highest level may grasp the unity of the powers of God, at the lower level people recognize the Logos as the Regent Power, and those still at the lowest level, immersed in the sensible world are unable to perceive the intelligible reality (Fug. 94; Abr. 124-125). Steps in mystic experience involve a realization of human nothingness, a realization that the one who acts is God alone, and abandonment of our sense of perception (Her. 69-71; Plant. 64; Conf. 95; Ebr. 152). A mystic state will produce a sensation of tranquility, and stability; it appears suddenly and is described as a sober intoxication (Gig. 49; Sacr. 78; Somn. 1.71; Op. 70-71).

8. Source of Intuition of the Infinite Reality

According to Philo the highest knowledge man may have is the knowledge of infinite reality which is not accessible by the normal senses, but by unmediated intuition of divinity. Humans were endowed with the mind, i.e., ability to reason and the outward senses. We received the first in order that we might consider the things that are discernable only by the intellect, the end of which is truth, and the second for the perception of visible things the end of which is opinion. Opinions are unstable, based on probability, and untrustworthy. Thus by this divine gift men are able to come to a conclusion about the existence of the divinity. They can do it in two ways: one is the apprehension of God through contemplation of his creation and forming a "conjectural conception of the Creator by a probable train of reasoning"(Praem. 43). And in the process the soul may climb the ladder to perfection by using natural means i.e., natural dispositions, instruction, i.e., being educated to virtue, or by meditation. The other is a direct apprehension by being instructed by God himself when the mind elevates itself above the physical world and perceives the uncreated One through a clear vision (Praem. 28-30, 40-66; LA 97-103). This vision is accessible to the "purified mind" to which God appears as One. To the mind uninitiated in the mysteries, unable to apprehend God alone by himself, but only through his actions, God appears as a triad constituted by him and his two powers, Creative and Royal (Abr. 97-103). Such a direct vision of God is not dependent on revelation but is possible because we have an impression of God in our mind, which is nothing but a tiny fragment of the Logos pervading the whole universe, not separated from its source, but only extended (Det. 90; Gig. 27; LA 1.37; Mut. 223; Spec. leg. 4.123). And we receive this portion of the Divine Mind at birth being endowed with a mind which makes us resemble God (Op. 65-69). At birth two powers enter every soul, the salutary (Beneficent) and the destructive (Unbounded). The world is created through these same powers. The creation is accomplished when " the salutary and beneficent (power) brings to an end the unbounded and destructive nature." Similarly, one or the other power may prevail in humans, but when the salutary power "brings to an end the unbounded and destructive nature" humans achieve immortality. Thus both the world and humans are a mixture of these powers and the prevailing one has the moral determination: "For the souls of foolish men have the unbounded and destructive rather than the powerful and salutary [power], and it is full of misery when it dwells with earthly creatures. But the prudent and noble [soul] receives the powerful and salutary [power] and, on the contrary, possesses in itself good fortune and happiness" (QE 1.23). Philo evidently analyzes these two powers on two levels. One is the divine level in which the Unlimited or the Unbounded is a representation of God's infinite and immeasurable goodness and creativity. The Logos keeps it in balance through the Limit. The other level is the human one where the Unlimited or the Unbounded represents destruction and everything morally abhorrent. Human reason is able, however, to maintain in it some kind of balance. This mind, divine and immortal, is an additional and differentiating part of the human soul which animates man just like the souls of animals which are devoid of mind. The notion of God's existence is thus imprinted in our mind that needs only some illumination to have a direct vision of God (Abr. 79-80; Det. 86-87; LA 1.38). Thus we can arrive at it through the dialectical reasoning as apprehension of the First Principle. Philo differentiates two modes for perceiving God, an inferential mode and a direct mode without mediation: "As long, therefore, as our mind still shines around and hovers around, pouring as it were a noontide light into the whole soul, we, being masters of ourselves, are not possessed by any extraneous influence" (Her. 264). Thus this direct mode is not in any way a type of inspiration or inspired prophecy; it is unlike "inspiration" when a "trance" or a "heaven-inflicted madness" seizes us and divine light sets as it happens "to the race of prophets" (Her. 265).

9. Philo's Doctrine of Creation

Philo attempts to bridge the Greek "scientific" or rational philosophy with the strictly mythical ideology of the Hebrew scriptures. As a basis for the "scientific" approach he uses the worldview presented by Plato in Timaeus which remained influential in Hellenistic times. The characteristic feature of the Greek scientific approach is the biological interpretation of the physical world in anthropocentric terms, in terms of purpose and function that may apply to biological and psychological realities but may not be applied to the physical world. Moreover, Philo operates often on two levels: the level of mythical Hebraic religious tradition and the level of philosophical speculation in the Greek tradition. Nevertheless, Philo attempts to harmonize the Mosaic and Platonic accounts of the generation of the world by interpreting the biblical story using Greek scientific categories and concepts. He elaborates a religious-philosophical worldview that became the foundation for the future Christian doctrine. Philo's doctrine of creation is intertwined with his doctrine of God and it answers two crucial questions: 1. Was the world created ex nihilo or from primordial matter? 2. Was creation a temporal act or is it an eternal process?

a. Philo's Model of Creation

Though Philo's model of creation comes from Plato's Timaeus, the direct agent of creation is not God himself (described in Plato as Demiurge, Maker, Artificer), but the Logos. Philo believes that the Logos is "the man of God" (Conf. 41) or the shadow of God that was used as an instrument and a pattern of all creation (LA 3.96). The Logos converted unqualified, unshaped preexistent matter, which Philo describes as "destitute of arrangement, of quality, of animation, of distinctive character and full of disorder and confusion," (Op. 22) into four primordial elements:

For it is out of that essence that God created everything, without indeed touching it himself, for it was not lawful for the all-wise and all-blessed God to touch materials which were all misshapen and confused, but he created them by the agency of his incorporeal powers, of which the proper name is Ideas, which he so exerted that every genus received its proper form (LA 1.329).

According to Philo, Moses anticipated Plato by teaching that water, darkness, and chaos existed before the world came into being (Op. 22).  Moses, having reached the philosophy summit, recognized that there are two fundamental principles of being, one, "an active cause, the intellect of the universe." The other is passive, "inanimate and incapable of motion by any intrinsic power of its own" (Op. 8-9), matter, lifeless and motionless. But Philo is ambiguous in such statements as these: "God, who created all things, not only brought them all to light, but he has even created what before had no existence, not only being their maker, but also their founder" (Somn. 1.76; Op. 81); "God who created the whole universe out of things that had no previous existence..." (LA 3.10). It seems that Philo does not refer here to God's creation of the visible world ex nihilo but to his creation of the intelligible Forms prior to the formation of the sensible world (Spec. leg. 1.328). Philo reasons that by analogy to the biblical version of the creation of man in the image of God, so the visible world as such must have been created in the image of its archetype present in the mind of God. "It is manifest also, that that archetypal seal, which we call that world which is perceptible only to the intellect, must itself be the archetypal model, the Idea of Ideas, the Logos of God" (Op. 25). In his doctrine of God Philo interprets the Logos, which is the Divine Mind as the Form of Forms (Platonic), the Idea of Ideas or the sum total of Forms or Ideas (Det. 75-76). The Logos is an indestructible Form of wisdom. Interpreting the garment of the high priest (Exod. 28:34; 36) Philo states: "But the seal is an Idea of Ideas, according to which God fashioned the world, being an incorporeal Idea, comprehensible only by the intellect" (Mig. 103). The invisible intelligible world which was used by the Logos as a model for creation or rather formation of the visible world from the (preexisting) unformed matter was created in the mind of God: "The incorporeal world then was already completed, having its seat in the Divine Logos and the world, perceptible by the external senses, was made on the model of it" (Op. 36). Describing Moses' account of the creation of man, Philo states also that Moses calls the invisible Divine Logos the Image of God (Op. 24; 31; LA 1.9). Forms, though inapprehensible in essence, leave an impress and a copy and procure qualities and shapes to shapeless things and unorganized matter. Mind can grasp the Forms by longing for wisdom. "The desire for wisdom alone is continual and incessant, and it fills all its pupils and disciples with famous and most beautiful doctrines" (Spec. leg. 1-45-50). Creation thus took place from preexistent shapeless matter (Plato's Receptacle) which is "the nurse of all becoming and change"  and for this creation God used the Forms which are his powers (Spec. leg. 1.327-329). This may seem a controversial point whether the primordial matter was preexistent or was created ex nihilo. Philo's view is not clearly stated and there are seemingly contradictory statements. In some places Philo states, "for as nothing is generated out of nothing, so neither can anything which exists be destroyed as to become non-existence" (Aet. 5-6). The same is repeated in his De Specialibus legibus: "Being made of us [i.e. elements] when you were born, you will again be dissolved into us when you come to die; for it is not the nature of any thing to be destroyed so as to become nonexistent, but the end brings it back to those elements from which its beginnings come" (Spec. 1.266). The resolution of this seeming controversy is to be found in Philo's theory of eternal creation, which is described next in connection with the Logos as the agent of creation. Philo, being a strict monist, could not accept the existence of independent and eternal preexistent matter (however disorganized and chaotic) as Plato did.

b. Eternal Creation

Philo denies the Aristotelian conclusion coming, according to him, from the superficial observation that the world existed from eternity, independent of any creative act. "For some men, admiring the world itself rather than the Creator of the world, have represented it as existing without any maker, and eternal, and as impiously and falsely have represented God as existing in a state of complete inactivity" (Op. 7). He elaborates instead his theory of the eternal creation (Prov. 1.6-9), as did Proclus (410-485 C.E.) much later in interpreting Plato.  Proclus brilliantly demonstrated that even in the theistic system the world though generated must be eternal, because the "world is always fabricated ... is always becoming to be."  Proclus believed, as did Philo, that the corporeal world is always coming into existence but never possesses real being. Thus God, according to Philo, did not begin to create the world at a certain moment, but he is "eternally applying himself to its creation" (Prov. 1.7; Op. 7; Aet. 83-84).

But God is the creator of time also, for he is the father of his father, and the father of time is the world, which made its own mother the creation of time, so that time stands towards God in the relation of a grandson; for this world is a younger son of God, inasmuch as it is perceptible by the outward sense, for the only son he speaks of as older than the world, is Idea, and this is not perceptible by the intellect, but having thought the other worthy of the rights of primogeniture, he has decided that it should remain with him; therefore, this younger son, perceptible by the external senses being set in motion, has caused the nature of time to shine forth, and to become conspicuous, so that there is nothing future to God, who has the very boundaries of time subject to him; for their life is not time, but the beautiful model of eternity; and in eternity nothing is past and nothing is future, but everything is present only (Deus. 31-32).

Philo contends that God thinks simultaneously with his acting or creating. "For God while he spake the word, did at the same moment create; nor did he allow anything to come between the Logos and the deed; and if one may advance a doctrine which is pretty nearly true, His Logos is his deed" (Sacr. 65; Mos.1.283). Thus any description of creation in temporal terms, e.g., by Moses, is not to be taken literally, but rather is an accommodation to the biblical language (Op. 19; Mut. 27; LA 2.9-13):

God is continuously ordering matter by his thought. His thinking was not anterior to his creating and there never was a time when he did not create, the Ideas themselves having been with him from the beginning. For God's will is not posterior to him, but is always with him, for natural motions never give out. Thus ever thinking he creates, and furnishes to sensible things the principle of their existence, so that both should exist together: the ever-creating Divine Mind and the sense-perceptible things to which beginning of being is given (Prov. 1.7).

Thus Philo postulates a crucial modification to the Platonic doctrine of the Forms, namely that God himself eternally creates the intelligible world of Ideas as his thoughts. The intelligible Forms are thus the principle of existence to the sensible things which are given through them their existence. This simply means in mystical terms that nothing exists or acts except God. On this ideal model God then orders and shapes the formless matter through the agency of his Logos (Her. 134, 140) into the objects of the sensible world:

Now we must form a somewhat similar opinion of God [Philo makes an analogy to a plan of the city in the mind of its builder], who, having determined to found a mighty state, first of all conceived its form in his mind, according to which form he made a world perceptible only by the intellect, and then completed one visible to the external senses, using the first one as a model (Op. 19).

Philo claims a scriptural support for these metaphysics saying that the creation of the world was after the pattern of an intelligible world (Gen. 1:17) which served as its model. During the first day God created Ideas or Forms of heaven, earth, air (= darkness), empty space  (= abyss), water, pneuma (= mind), light, the intelligible pattern of the sun and the stars (Op. 29). There are, however, differences between Philo and Plato: according to Plato, there is no Form of space (chora). In Plato space is not apprehended by reason; rather it had its own special status in the world. Also pneuma as a Form of soul does not exist in the system of Plato. Plato designates this primordial unorganized state of matter a self-existing Receptacle; it is most stable and a permanent constituent: "It must be called always the same, for it never departs at all from its own character" (Plato, Timaeus 50b-c). Philo, being a strict monist could not allow even for a self-existing void so he makes its pattern an eternal idea in the divine mind. Before Philo there was no explicit theory of creation ex nihilo ever postulated in Jewish or Greek traditions. Both Philo and Plato do not explain how the reflections (eidola) of Forms are made in the world of senses. They do not attribute them to God or the Demiurge because it would be contrary to their conception of God as "good" and "desiring that all things should come as near as possible to being like himself."  God could not create the copies of the Forms which should be "disordered." It seems then that the primordial unorganized matter was spontaneously produced on the pattern of the Ideas. The Logos would shape the elements from this preexistent matter, first into heavy (or dense) and light (or rare) elements which were differentiated properly into water and earth, and air and fire (Her. 134-140; 143). As in Plato certain geometrical descriptions characterize Philo's elements. Fire was characterized by a pyramid, air by an octahedron, water by an icosahedron, and earth by a cube (QG 3.49). In Plato's theory too, one can envision a sort of automatic reflection of the Forms in the Receptacle due to the properties of Forms. God could not, according to Philo's philosophy, create the preexistent matter. "And what God praised was not the materials which he had worked up in creation, destitute of life and melody, and easily dissolved, and moreover in their own intrinsic nature perishable, and out of proportion and full of iniquity, but rather his own skillful work, completed according to one equal and well-proportioned power and knowledge always alike and identical." (Her. 160). Logically, God is for Philo indirectly the source of preexistent matter but Philo does not ascribe to God even the shaping of matter directly. In fact this unorganized matter never existed because it was simultaneously ordered into organized matter – the four elements from which the world is made.

10. Doctrine of Miracles: Naturalism and Comprehension

Closely connected with Philo's doctrine of creation is his doctrine of miracles. His favorite statement is that "everything is possible with God." This, however, does not mean that God can act outside the natural order of things or his own nature. Thus Philo emphasizes that God's miraculous works are within the realm of the natural order. Doing this he extends the natural order to encompass the biblical miracles and tries to explain them by their coincidence with natural events. For example, the miracle at the Red Sea which he characterizes as a "mighty work of nature" (Mos. 1.165), or the plague of darkness as a total eclipse (Mos. 1.123), or the story of Balaam as an allegorical one (Cher. 32-35). This was the tendency inherited from some Stoics who attempted to explain miracles of divination as events preordered in nature by the divine power pervading it. Similarly Philo considers the biblical miracles as a part of the eternal pattern of the Logos acting in nature. Augustine considers miracles as implanted in the destiny of the cosmos since the time of its creation.  Philo and rabbinic literature emphasize the miraculous and marvelous character of nature itself. All natural things are wonderful, but are "despised by us by reason of our familiarity with them" and all things with which we are unaccustomed, make an impression on us "for the love of novelty"(Mos. 1.2-213). Even in modern Jewish teaching there is a tendency to explain the miraculous by the natural. Thus the one can find a certain discrepancy in Philo's writing: on one hand Philo is rationalist and naturalist in the spirit of Greek philosophical tradition, on the other, he follows popular religion to preserve the biblical tradition. Philo emphasizes, however, that we are limited in our human capabilities to "comprehend everything" about the physical world, and it is better to "suspend our judgment" than to err:

But since we are found to be influenced in different manners by the same things at different times, we should have nothing positive to assert about anything, inasmuch as what appears has no settled or stationary existence, but is subject to various, and multiform, and ever-recurring changes. For it follows of necessity, since the imagination is unstable, that judgment formed by it must be unstable; and there are many reasons for this (Ebr. 170).

But we are able to comprehend things by comparing them with their opposites and thus arriving at their true nature. The same applies to what is virtue and to what is vice, and to what is just and good and to what is unjust and bad.

And, indeed, if any one considers everything that is in the world, he will be able to arrive at a proper estimate of its character, by taking it in the same manner; for each separate thing is by itself incomprehensible, but by a comparison with another thing, is easy to understand (Ebr. 187).

The same reasoning he extends to differences between national customs and ancient laws which vary according to countries, nations, cities, different villages, even private houses and instruction received by people from childhood.

And since this is the case, who is foolish enough and ridiculous as to affirm positively that such and such a thing is just, or wise, or honorable, or expedient? For whatever this man defines as such, some one else, who from his childhood has learnt a contrary lesson, will be sure to deny (Ebr. 197).

11. Doctrine of the Logos in Philo's Writings

The pivotal and the most developed doctrine in Philo's writings on which hinges his entire philosophical system, is his doctrine of the Logos. By developing this doctrine he fused Greek philosophical concepts with Hebrew religious thought and provided the foundation for Christianity, first in the development of the Christian Pauline myth and speculations of John, later in the Hellenistic Christian Logos and Gnostic doctrines of the second century. All other doctrines of Philo hinge on his interpretation of divine existence and action. The term Logos was widely used in the Greco-Roman culture and in Judaism. Through most schools of Greek philosophy, this term was used to designate a rational, intelligent and thus vivifying principle of the universe. This principle was deduced from an understanding of the universe as a living reality and by comparing it to a living creature. Ancient people did not have the dynamic concept of "function," therefore, every phenomenon had to have an underlying factor, agent, or principle responsible for its occurrence. In the Septuagint version of the Old Testament the term logos (Hebrew davar) was used frequently to describe God's utterances (Gen. 1:3, 6,9; 3:9,11; Ps. 32:9), God's action (Zech. 5:1-4; Ps. 106:20; Ps. 147:15), and messages of prophets by means of which God communicated his will to his people (Jer. 1:4-19, 2:1-7; Ezek. 1:3; Amos 3:1). Logos is used here only as a figure of speech designating God's activity or action. In the so-called Jewish wisdom literature we find the concept of Wisdom (hokhmah and sophia) which could be to some degree interpreted as a separate personification or individualization (hypostatization), but it is contrasted often with human stupidity. In the Hebrew culture it was a part of the metaphorical and poetic language describing divine wisdom as God's attribute and it clearly refers to a human characteristic in the context of human earthly existence. The Greek, metaphysical concept of the Logos is in sharp contrast to the concept of a personal God described in anthropomorphic terms typical of Hebrew thought. Philo made a synthesis of the two systems and attempted to explain Hebrew thought in terms of Greek philosophy by introducing the Stoic concept of the Logos into Judaism. In the process the Logos became transformed from a metaphysical entity into an extension of a divine and transcendental anthropomorphic being and mediator between God and men. Philo offered various descriptions of the Logos.

a. The Utterance of God

Following the Jewish mythical tradition, Philo represents the Logos as the utterance of God found in the Jewish scripture of the Old Testament since God's words do not differ from his actions (Sacr. 8; Somn. 1.182; Op. 13).

b. The Divine Mind

Philo accepts the Platonic intelligible Forms. Forms exist forever though the impressions they make may perish with the substance on which they were made (Det. 75-77; Mut. 80, 122. 146; Cher. 51). They are not, however, beings existing separately, only exist in the mind of God as his thoughts and powers. Philo explicitly identifies Forms with God's powers. Those powers are his glory, though invisible and sensed only by the purest intellect. "And though they are by nature inapprehensible in their essence, still they show a kind of impression or copy of their energy and operation"(Spec. leg. 1.45-50). In his doctrine of God Philo interprets the Logos, which is the Divine Mind, as the Form of Forms (Platonic), the Idea of Ideas or the sum total of Forms or Ideas. Logos is the indestructible Form of wisdom comprehensible only by the intellect (Det. 75-76; Mig. 103).

c. God's Transcendent Power

The Logos which God begat eternally because it is a manifestation of God's thinking-acting (Prov. 1.7; Sacr. 65; Mos. 1.283), is an agent that unites two powers of the transcendent God. Philo relates that in an inspiration his own soul told him:

...that in the one living and true God there were two supreme and primary powers, Goodness [or Creative Power] and Authority [or Regent Power]; and that by his Goodness he had created every thing; and that by his Authority he governed all that he had created; and that the third thing which was between the two, and had the effect of bringing them together was the Logos, for it was owing to the Logos that God was both a ruler and good (Cher. 1.27-28).

And further, Philo finds in the Bible indications of the operation of the Logos, e.g., the biblical cherubim are the symbols of the two powers of God but the flaming sword (Gen. 3.24) is the symbol of the Logos conceived before all things and before all manifest (Cher. 1.27-28; Sacr. 59; Abr. 124-125; Her. 166; QE 2.68). Philo's description of the Logos (the Mind of God) corresponds to the Greek concept of mind as hot and fiery. Philo obviously refers in these powers to the Unlimited (apeiron) and the Limited (peras) of Plato's Philebus and earlier Pythagorean tradition, and they will later reappear in Plotinus as Nous. In Plato these two principles or powers operate at the metaphysical, cosmic (cosmic soul) and human (human soul) levels. Philo considers these powers to be inherent in transcendental God, and that God himself may be thought of as multiplicity in unity. The Beneficent (Creative) and Regent (Authoritative) Powers are called God and Lord, respectively. Goodness is Boundless Power, Creative, and God. The Regent Power is also Punitive Power and Lord (Her. 166). Creative Power, moreover, permeates the world, the power by which God made and ordered all things. Philo follows the ideas of the Stoics that nous pervades every part of the universe as it does the soul in us. Therefore, Philo asserts that the aspect of God which transcends his powers (which we have to understand to be the Logos) cannot be conceived of in terms of place but as pure being, "but that power of his by which he made and ordered all things called God, in accordance with the etymology of that name, enfolds the whole and passes through the parts of the universe" (Conf. 136-137). According to Philo, the two powers of God are separated by God himself who is standing above in the midst of them (Her. 166). Referring to Genesis 18: 2 Philo claims that God and his two Powers are in reality one. To the human mind they appear as a Triad, with God above the powers that belong to him: "For this cannot be so keen of spirit that, it can see Him who is above the powers that belong to Him, (namely) God, distinct from everything else. For so soon as one sets eyes on God, there also appear together with His being, the ministering powers, so that in place of one he makes the appearance of a triad (QG 4.2)." In addition to these two main powers, there are other powers of the Father and his Logos, including merciful and legislative (Fug. 94-95).

d. First-born Son of God

The Logos has an origin, but as God's thought it also has eternal generation. It exists as such before everything else all of which are secondary products of God's thought and therefore it is called the "first-born." The Logos is thus more than a quality, power, or characteristic of God; it is an entity eternally generated as an extension, to which Philo ascribes many names and functions. The Logos is the first-begotten Son of the Uncreated Father: "For the Father of the universe has caused him to spring up as the eldest son, whom, in another passage, he [Moses] calls the first-born; and he who is thus born, imitating the ways of his father, has formed such and such species, looking to his archetypal patterns" (Conf. 63). This picture is somewhat confusing because we learn that in the final analysis the Creative Power is also identified with the Logos. The Creative Power is logically prior to the Regent Power since it is conceptually older. Though the powers are of equal age, the creative is prior because one is king not of the nonexistent but of what has already come into being (QE 2.62).  These two powers thus delimit the bounds of heaven and the world. The Creative Power is concerned that things that come into being through it should not be dissolved, and the Regent Power that nothing either exceeds or is robbed of its due, all being arbitrated by the laws of equality through which things continue eternally (QE 2.64). The positive properties of God may be subdivided into these two polar forces; therefore, the expression of the One is the Logos that constitutes the manifestation of God's thinking, acting (Prov. 1.7; Sacr. 65; Mos. 1.283). According to Philo these powers of the Logos can be grasped at various levels. Those who are at the summit level grasp them as constituting an indivisible unity. At the two lower levels, respectively, are those who know the Logos as the Creative Power and beneath them those who know it as the Regent Power (Fug. 94-95; Abr. 124-125). The next level down represents those limited to the sensible world, unable to perceive the intelligible realities (Gig. 20). At each successively lower level of divine knowledge the image of God's essence is increasingly more obscured. These two powers will appear again in Plotinus. Here Undefined or Unlimited Intelligible Matter proceeds from the One and then turns back to its source (Enneads 2.4.5; 5.4.2; 6.7.17)

e. Universal Bond: in the Physical World and in the Human Soul

The Logos is the bond holding together all the parts of the world. And as a part of the human soul it holds the body together and permits its operation. In the mind of a wise man thoroughly purified, it allows preservation of virtues in an unimpaired condition (Fug. 112). "And the Logos, which connects together and fastens every thing, is peculiarly full itself of itself, having no need whatever of any thing beyond" (Her. 188).

f. Immanent Reason

The reasoning capacity of a human mind is but a portion of the all-pervading Divine Logos. Mind is a special gift to humans from God and it has divine essence, therefore, as such, it is imperishable. By receiving this humans received freedom and the power of spontaneous will free from necessity (Deus. 47). Philo emphasizes that man "has received this one extraordinary gift, intellect, which is accustomed to comprehend the nature of all bodies and of all things at the same time." Thus humanity resembles God in the sense of having free volition for unlike plants and other animals, the soul of man received from God the power of voluntary motion and in this respect resembles God (Deus. 48). This concept, that it is chiefly in the intellect and free volition that makes humans differ from other life forms, has a long history which can be traced to Anaxagoras and Aristotle.  Philo calls "men of God" those people who made God-inspired intellectual life their dominant issue. Such men "have entirely transcended the sensible sphere, and migrated to the intelligible world, and dwell there enrolled as citizens of the Commonwealth of Ideas, which are imperishable, and incorporeal ... those who are born of God are priests and prophets who have not thought fit to mix themselves up in the constitutions of this world...."(Gig. 61). Philo writes in reference to the Old Testament expression that God "breathed into" (equivalent of "inspired" or "gave life to") inanimate things that through this act God extended his spirit into humans (LA 1.37). Though his spirit is distributed among men it is not diminished (Gig. 27). The nature of the reasoning power in men is indivisible from the Divine Logos, but "though they are indivisible themselves, they divide an innumerable multitude of other things." Just as the Divine Logos divided and distributed everything in nature (that is, it gave qualities to undifferentiated, primordial matter), so the human mind by exertion of its intellect is able to divide everything and everybody into an infinite number of parts. And this is possible because it resembles the Logos of the Creator and Father of the universe: "So that, very naturally, the two things which thus resemble each other, both the mind which is in us and that which is above us, being without parts and invisible, will still be able in a powerful manner to divide and distribute [comprehend] all existing things" (Her. 234-236; Det. 90). Uninitiated minds are unable to apprehend the Existent by itself; they only perceive it through its actions. To them God appears as a Triad -- himself and his two Powers: Creative and Ruling. To the "purified soul," however, God appears as One.

When, therefore, the soul is shone upon by God as if at noonday, and when it is wholly and entirely filled with that light which is appreciable only by the intellect, and by being wholly surrounded with its brilliancy is free from all shackle or darkness, it then perceives a threefold image of one subject, one image of the living God, and others of the other two, as if they were shadows irradiated by it .... but he claims that the term shadow is just a more vivid representation of the matter intended to be intimated. Since this is not the actual truth, but in order that one may when speaking keep as close to the truth as possible, the one in the middle is the Father of the universe, who in the sacred scripture is called by his proper name, I am that I am; and the beings on each side are those most ancient powers which are always close to the living God, one of which is called his Creative Power, and the other his Royal Power. And the Creative Power is God, for it is by this that he made and arranged the universe; and the Royal Power is the Lord, for it is fitting that the Creator should lord it over and govern the creature. Therefore, the middle person of the three, being attended by each of his powers as by body-guard, presents to the mind, which is endowed with the faculty of sight, a vision at one time of one being, and at another time of three; of one when the soul being completely purified, and having surmounted not only the multitude of numbers, but also the number two, which is the neighbour of the unit, hastens onward to that idea which is devoid of mixture, free from all combination, and by itself in need of nothing else whatever; and of three, when, not being as yet made perfect as to the important virtues, it is still seeking for initiation in those of less consequence, and is not able to attain to a comprehension of the living God by its own unassisted faculties without the aid of something else, but can only do so by judging of his deeds, whether as creator or as governor. This then, as they say, is the second best thing; and it no less partakes in the opinion which is dear to and devoted to God. But the first-mentioned disposition has no such share, but is itself the very God-loving and God-beloved opinion itself, or rather it is truth which is older than opinion, and more valuable than any seeming (Abr. 119-123).

The one category of enlightened people is able to comprehend God through a vision beyond the physical universe. It is as though they advanced on a heavenly ladder and conjectured the existence of God through an inference (Praem. 40). The other category apprehends him through himself, as light is seen by light. For God gave man such a perception "as should prove to him that God exists, and not to show him what God is." Philo believes that even the existence of God "cannot possibly be contemplated by any other being; because, in fact, it is not possible for God to be comprehended by any being but himself " (Praem. 39-40). Philo adds, "Only men who have raised themselves upward from below, so as, through the contemplation of his works, to form a conjectural conception of the Creator by a probable train of reasoning" (Praem. 43) are holy, and are his servants. Next Philo explains how such men have an impression of God's existence as revealed by God himself, by the similitude of the sun (Mut. 4-6) a concept which he borrowed from Plato.  As light is seen in consequence of its own presence so, "In the same manner God, being his own light, is perceived by himself alone, nothing and no other being co-operating with or assisting him, a being at all able to contribute to pure comprehension of his existence; But these men have arrived at the real truth, who form their ideas of God from God, of light from light" (Praem. 45-46). As Plato and Philo had done, Plotinus later used this image of the sun. Thus the Logos, eternally created (begotten), is an expression of the immanent powers of God, and at the same time, it emanates into everything in the world.

g. Immanent Mediator of the Physical Universe

In certain places in his writings Philo accepts the Stoic theory of the immanent Logos as the power or Law binding the opposites in the universe and mediating between them, and directing the world. For example, Philo envisions that the world is suspended in a vacuum and asks, how is it that the world does not fall down since it is not held by any solid thing. Philo then gives the answer that the Logos extending himself from the center to its bounds and from its extremities to the center again, runs nature's course joining and binding fast all its parts. Likewise the Logos prevents the earth from being dissolved by all the water contained within. The Logos produces a harmony (a favorite expression of the Stoics) between various parts of the universe (Plant. 8-10). Thus Philo sees God as only indirectly the Creator of the world: God is the author of the invisible, intelligible world which served as a model for the Logos. Philo says Moses called this archetypal heavenly power by various names: "the beginning, the image, and the sight of God"(LA 1.43). Following the views of Plato and the Stoics, Philo believed that in all existing things there must be an active cause, and a passive subject; and that the active cause Philo designates as the Logos. He gives the impression that he believed that the Logos functions like the Platonic "Soul of the World" (Aet. 84).

h. The Angel of the Lord, Revealer of God

Philo describes the Logos as the revealer of God symbolized in the Scripture (Gen. 31:13; 16:8; etc) by an angel of the Lord (Somn. 1.228-239; Cher. 1-3). The Logos is the first-born and the eldest and chief of the angels.

i. Multi-Named Archetype

Philo's Logos has many names (Conf. 146).  Philo identifies his Logos with Wisdom of Proverbs 8:22 (Ebr. 31). Moreover, Moses, according to Philo called this Wisdom "Beginning," "Image," "Sight of God." And his personal wisdom is an imitation of the archetypal Divine Wisdom. All terrestrial wisdom and virtue are but copies and representations of the heavenly Logos (LA 1.43, 45-46).

j. Soul-Nourishing Manna and Wisdom

God sends "the stream" from his Wisdom which irrigates God-loving souls; consequently they become filled with "manna." Manna is described by Philo as a "generic thing" coming from God. It does not come from God directly, however: "the most generic is God, and next is the Logos of God, the other things subsist in word (Logos) only" (LA 2.86). According to Philo, Moses called manna "the most ancient Logos of God (Det. 118)." Next Philo explains that men are "nourished by the whole word (Logos) of God, and by every portion of it ... Accordingly, the soul of the more perfect man is nourished by the whole word (Logos); but we must be contented if we are nourished by a portion of it" (LA 3.175-176). And "the Wisdom of God, which is the nurse and foster-mother and educator of those who desire incorruptible food ... immediately supplies food to those which are brought forth by her ... but the fountain of divine wisdom is borne along, at one time in a more gentle and moderate stream, and at another with greater rapidity and a more exceeding violence and impetuosity....(Det. 115-117). This Wisdom as the Daughter of God "has obtained a nature intact and undefiled both because of her own propriety and the dignity of him who begot her." Having identified the Logos with Wisdom, Philo runs into a grammatical problem: in the Greek language "wisdom" (sophia) is feminine and "word" (logos) is masculine; moreover, Philo saw Wisdom's function as masculine. So he explains that Wisdom's name is feminine, but her nature is masculine:

Indeed all the virtues have women's designations, but powers and activities of truly perfect men. For that which comes after God, even if it were the most venerable of all other things, holds second place, and was called feminine in contrast to the Creator of the universe, who is masculine, and in accordance with its resemblance to everything else. For the feminine always falls short and is inferior to the masculine, which has priority. Let us then pay no attention to the discrepancy in the terms, and say that the daughter of God, Wisdom, is both masculine and the father, inseminating and engendering in souls a desire to learn discipline, knowledge, practical insight, notable and laudable actions (Fug. 50-52).

k. Intermediary Power

The fundamental doctrine propounded by Philo is that of Logos as an intermediary power, a messenger and mediator between God and the world.

And the father who created the universe has given to his archangel and most ancient Logos a pre-eminent gift, to stand on the confines of both, and separate that which had been created from the Creator. And this same Logos is continually a suppliant to the immortal God on behalf of the mortal race, which is exposed to affliction and misery; and is also the ambassador, sent by the Ruler of all, to the subject race. And the Logos rejoices.... saying "And I stood in the midst, between the Lord and you" (Num. 16:48); neither being uncreated as God, nor yet created as you, but being in the midst between these two extremities, like a hostage, as it were, to both parties (Her. 205-206).

When speaking of the high priest, Philo describes the Logos as God's son, a perfect being procuring forgiveness of sins and blessings: "For it was indispensable that the man who was consecrated to the Father of the world [the high priest] should have as a paraclete, his son, the being most perfect in all virtue, to procure forgiveness of sins, and a supply of unlimited blessings" (Mos. 2.134). Philo transforms the Stoic impersonal and immanent Logos into a being who was neither eternal like God nor created like creatures, but begotten from eternity. This being is a mediator giving hope to men and who "was sent down to earth." God, according to Philo, sends "the stream of his own wisdom" to men "and causes the changed soul to drink of unchangeable health; for the abrupt rock is the wisdom of God, which being both sublime and the first of things he quarried out of his own powers." After the souls are watered they are filled with the manna which "is called something which is the primary genus of everything. But the most universal of all things is God; and in the second place is the Logos of God"(LA 2.86). Through the Logos of God men learn all kinds of instruction and everlasting wisdom (Fug. 127-120). The Logos is the "cupbearer of God ... being itself in an unmixed state, the pure delight and sweetness, and pouring forth and joy, and ambrosial medicine of pleasure and happiness" (Somn. 2.249). This wisdom was represented by the tabernacle of the Old Testament which was "a thing made after the model and in imitation of Wisdom" and sent down to earth "in the midst of our impurity in order that we may have something whereby we may be purified, washing off and cleansing all those things which dirty and defile our miserable life, full of all evil reputation as it is" (Her. 112-113). "God therefore sows and implants terrestrial virtue in the human race, being an imitation and representation of the heavenly virtue" (LA 1.45).

l. "God"

In three passages Philo describes the Logos even as God:

a.) Commenting on Genesis 22:16 Philo explains that God could only swear by himself (LA 3.207).
b.) When the scripture uses the Greek term for God ho theos, it refers to the true God, but when it uses the term theos, without the article ho, it refers not to the God, but to his most ancient Logos (Somn. 1.229-230).
c.) Commenting on Genesis 9:6 Philo states the reference to creation of man after the image of God is to the second deity, the Divine Logos of the Supreme being and to the father himself, because it is only fitting that the rational soul of man cannot be in relation to the preeminent and transcendent Divinity (QG 2.62).

Philo himself, however, explains that to call the Logos "God" is not a correct appellation (Somn.1.230). Also, through this Logos, which men share with God, men know God and are able to perceive Him (LA 1.37-38).

m. Summary of Philo's Concept of the Logos

Philo's doctrine of the Logos is blurred by his mystical and religious vision, but his Logos is clearly the second individual in one God as a hypostatization of God's Creative Power - Wisdom. The supreme being is God and the next is Wisdom or the Logos of God (Op. 24). Logos has many names as did Zeus (LA 1.43,45,46), and multiple functions. Earthly wisdom is but a copy of this celestial Wisdom. It was represented in historical times by the tabernacle through which God sent an image of divine excellence as a representation and copy of Wisdom (Lev. 16:16; Her. 112-113). The Divine Logos never mixes with the things which are created and thus destined to perish, but attends the One alone. This Logos is apportioned into an infinite number of parts in humans, thus we impart the Divine Logos. As a result we acquire some likeness to the Father and the Creator of all (Her. 234-236). The Logos is the Bond of the universe and mediator extended in nature. The Father eternally begat the Logos and constituted it as an unbreakable bond of the universe that produces harmony (Plant. 9-10). The Logos, mediating between God and the world, is neither uncreated as God nor created as men. So in Philo's view the Father is the Supreme Being and the Logos, as his chief messenger, stands between Creator and creature. The Logos is an ambassador and suppliant, neither unbegotten nor begotten as are sensible things (Her. 205). Wisdom, the Daughter of God, is in reality masculine because powers have truly masculine descriptions, whereas virtues are feminine. That which is in the second place after the masculine Creator was called feminine, according to Philo, but her priority is masculine; so the Wisdom of God is both masculine and feminine (Fug. 50-52). Wisdom flows from the Divine Logos (Fug. 137-138). The Logos is the Cupbearer of God. He pours himself into happy souls (Somn. 2.249). The immortal part of the soul comes from the divine breath of the Father/Ruler as a part of his Logos.

12. List of abbreviations to Philo's works

Abr. De Abrahamo;
Aet. De Aeternitate Mundi;
Agr. De Agricultura;
Anim. De Animalibus;
Cher. De Cherubim;
Conf. De Confusione Linguarum;
Congr. De Congressu Eruditionis Gratia;
Cont. De Vita Contemplativa;
Decal. De Decalogo;
Det. Quod Deterius Potiori Insidiari Soleat;
Deus. Quod Deus Sit Immutabilis;
Ebr. De Ebrietate;
Flac. In Flaccum;
Fug. De Fuga et Inventione;
Gig. De Gigantibus;
Her. Quis Rerum Divinarum Heres Sit;
Hypoth. Hypothetica;
Jos. De Josepho;
LA  Legum Allegoriarum;
Legat. Legatio ad Gaium;
Mig. De Migratione Abrahami;
Mut. De Mutatione Nominum;
Op. De Opificio Mundi;
Plant. De Plantatione;
Post. De Posteritate Caini;
Praem. De Praemiis et Poenis;
Prob. Quod Omnis Probus Liber Sit;
Prov. De Providentia;
QE  Quaestiones et Solutiones in Exodum;
QG  Quaestiones et Solutiones in Genesim;
Sacr. De Sacrificiis Abelis et Caini;
Sobr. De Sobrietate;
Somn. De Somniis;
Spec. leg. De Specialibus Legibus;
Virt. De Virtutibus.

13. Editions of Philo's works and their translations

The Greek texts of Philo's works:

  • Philonis Judaei Opera Omnia. Textus editus ad fidem optimarum editionum. (Lipsiae: Sumptibus E.B.  Schwickerti, 1828-1829), Vol. 1-6.
  • Philonis Alexandrini Opera Quae Supersunt. Ediderunt Leopoldus Cohn et Paulus Wendland (Berolini: Typis et impensis Georgii Reimeri/ Walther de Gruyter & Co., MDCCCLXXXXVI – MCMXXX, reprinted in 1962). Vols. 1-7.

The Armenian text and its English translation:

  • A. Terian, Philonis Alexandrini De Animalibus: The Armenian Text with an Introduction, Translation, and Commentary. Studies in Hellenistic Judaism, Supplements to Studia Philonica 1. (Chico: Scholars Press, 1981).

Translations of complete works:

  • The Works of Philo. Complete and Unabridged. Translated by Charles Duke Yonge, New Updated Edition. (Hedrickson Publishers, 1995).
  • F. H. Colson and G. H. Whitaker, eds., The Works of Philo (Cambridge, Mass: Loeb Classical Library, Harvard University Press; London: William Heinemann, 1929-1953), Vols. 1-10. Ralph Marcus, ed, Vols 10-12, containing works of Philo available only in Armenian.

Selections of works of Philo in translation:

  • Philo, Selections ed., Hans Lewy in Three Jewish Philosophers (Cleveland, New York, Philadelphia, 1961).
  • Philo of Alexandria, The Contemplative Life, The Giants, and Selections. Translation and Introduction by David Winston. Preface by John Dillon. (New York/ Ramsey/Toronto: Paulist Press, 1981).
  • Ronald  Williamson, Jews in the Hellenistic World: Philo (Cambridge: Cambridge
    University Press, 1989).

14. Major Works on Philo

  • T. H. Billings, The Platonism of Philo Judaeus (Chicago, 1919).
  • H. A. Wolfson, Philo (Cambridge, Mass: Harvard University Press, 1947), Vols 1-2.
  • C. H. Dodd, The Interpretation of the Fourth Gospel (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1963).
  • Ronald Williamson, Philo and the Epistle to the Hebrews (Leiden: E. J. Brill, 1970).
  • R. C. Baer, Philo's Use of the Categories Male and Female (Leiden: E. J. Brill, 1970).
  • S. Sandmel, Philo of Alexandria: An Introduction (New York/Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1979).
  • Harold W. Attridge, The Epistle to the Hebrews (Hermeneia; Philadelphia: Fortress Press, 1989).
  • Dorothy Sly, Philo's Perception of Women (Atlanta: Scholars Press, 1990).
  • Ross Shepard Kraemer, Her Share of the Blessings: Women's religions among Pagans, Jews, and Christians in the Greco-Roman World (NewYork /Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1992).
  • John M. Dillon, The Middle Platonists (Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press, 1977, 1996).

Author Information

Marian Hillar
Center for Philosophy and Socinian Studies

U. S. A.

Plato: Political Philosophy

platoPlato (c. 427-347 B.C.E.) developed such distinct areas of philosophy as epistemology, metaphysics, ethics, and aesthetics. His deep influence on Western philosophy is asserted in the famous remark of Alfred North Whitehead: “the safest characterization of the European philosophical tradition is that it consists of a series of footnotes to Plato.” He was also the prototypical political philosopher whose ideas had a profound impact on subsequent political theory. His greatest impact was Aristotle, but he influenced Western political thought in many ways. The Academy, the school he founded in 385 B.C.E., became the model for other schools of higher learning and later for European universities.The philosophy of Plato is marked by the usage of dialectic, a method of discussion involving ever more profound insights into the nature of reality, and by cognitive optimism, a belief in the capacity of the human mind to attain the truth and to use this truth for the rational and virtuous ordering of human affairs. Plato believes that conflicting interests of different parts of society can be harmonized. The best, rational and righteous, political order, which he proposes, leads to a harmonious unity of society and allows each of its parts to flourish, but not at the expense of others. The theoretical design and practical implementation of such order, he argues, are impossible without virtue.

Table of Contents

  1. Life - from Politics to Philosophy
  2. The Threefold Task of Political Philosophy
  3. The Quest for Justice in The Republic
  4. The Best Political Order
  5. The Government of Philosopher Rulers
  6. Politics and the Soul
  7. Plato’s Achievement

1. Life - from Politics to Philosophy

Plato was born in Athens in c. 427 B.C.E. Until his mid-twenties, Athens was involved in a long and disastrous military conflict with Sparta, known as the Peloponnesian War. Coming from a distinguished family - on his father’s side descending from Codrus, one of the early kings of Athens, and on his mother’s side from Solon, the prominent reformer of the Athenian constitution - he was naturally destined to take an active role in political life. But this never happened. Although cherishing the hope of assuming a significant place in his political community, he found himself continually thwarted. As he relates in his autobiographical Seventh Letter, he could not identify himself with any of the contending political parties or the succession of corrupt regimes, each of which brought Athens to further decline (324b-326a). He was a pupil of Socrates, whom he considered the most just man of his time, and who, although did not leave any writings behind, exerted a large influence on philosophy. It was Socrates who, in Cicero’s words, “called down philosophy from the skies.” The pre-Socratic philosophers were mostly interested in cosmology and ontology; Socrates’ concerns, in contrast, were almost exclusively moral and political issues. In 399 when a democratic court voted by a large majority of its five hundred and one jurors for Socrates’ execution on an unjust charge of impiety, Plato came to the conclusion that all existing governments were bad and almost beyond redemption. “The human race will have no respite from evils until those who are really philosophers acquire political power or until, through some divine dispensation, those who rule and have political authority in the cities become real philosophers” (326a-326b).

It was perhaps because of this opinion that he retreated to his Academy and to Sicily for implementing his ideas. He visited Syracuse first in 387, then in 367, and again in 362-361, with the general purpose to moderate the Sicilian tyrants with philosophical education and to establish a model political rule. But this adventure with practical politics ended in failure, and Plato went back to Athens. His Academy, which provided a base for succeeding generations of Platonic philosophers until its final closure in C.E. 529, became the most famous teaching institution of the Hellenistic world. Mathematics, rhetoric, astronomy, dialectics, and other subjects, all seen as necessary for the education of philosophers and statesmen, were studied there. Some of Plato’s pupils later became leaders, mentors, and constitutional advisers in Greek city-states. His most renowned pupil was Aristotle. Plato died in c. 347 B.C.E. During his lifetime, Athens turned away from her military and imperial ambitions and became the intellectual center of Greece. She gave host to all the four major Greek philosophical schools founded in the course of the fourth century: Plato’s Academy, Aristotle’s Lyceum, and the Epicurean and Stoic schools.

2. The Threefold Task of Political Philosophy

Although the Republic, the Statesman, the Laws and a few shorter dialogues are considered to be the only strictly political dialogues of Plato, it can be argued that political philosophy was the area of his greatest concern. In the English-speaking world, under the influence of twentieth century analytic philosophy, the main task of political philosophy today is still often seen as conceptual analysis: the clarification of political concepts. To understand what this means, it may be useful to think of concepts as the uses of words. When we use general words, such as “table,” “chair,” “pen,” or political terms, such as “state,” “power,” “democracy,” or “freedom,” by applying them to different things, we understand them in a certain way, and hence assign to them certain meanings. Conceptual analysis then is a mental clearance, the clarification of a concept in its meaning. As such it has a long tradition and is first introduced in Platonic dialogues. Although the results are mostly inconclusive, in “early” dialogues especially, Socrates tries to define and clarify various concepts. However, in contrast to what it is for some analytic philosophers, for Plato conceptual analysis is not an end to itself, but a preliminary step. The next step is critical evaluation of beliefs, deciding which one of the incompatible ideas is correct and which one is wrong. For Plato, making decisions about the right political order are, along with the choice between peace and war, the most important choices one can make in politics. Such decisions cannot be left solely to public opinion, he believes, which in many cases does not have enough foresight and gets its lessons only post factum from disasters recorded in history. In his political philosophy, the clarification of concepts is thus a preliminary step in evaluating beliefs, and right beliefs in turn lead to an answer to the question of the best political order. The movement from conceptual analysis, through evaluation of beliefs, to the best political order can clearly be seen in the structure of Plato’s Republic.

3. The Quest for Justice in The Republic

One of the most fundamental ethical and political concepts is justice. It is a complex and ambiguous concept. It may refer to individual virtue, the order of society, as well as individual rights in contrast to the claims of the general social order. In Book I of the Republic, Socrates and his interlocutors discuss the meaning of justice. Four definitions that report how the word “justice” (dikaiosune) is actually used, are offered. The old man of means Cephalus suggests the first definition. Justice is “speaking the truth and repaying what one has borrowed” (331d). Yet this definition, which is based on traditional moral custom and relates justice to honesty and goodness; i.e. paying one’s debts, speaking the truth, loving one’s country, having good manners, showing proper respect for the gods, and so on, is found to be inadequate. It cannot withstand the challenge of new times and the power of critical thinking. Socrates refutes it by presenting a counterexample. If we tacitly agree that justice is related to goodness, to return a weapon that was borrowed from someone who, although once sane, has turned into a madman does not seem to be just but involves a danger of harm to both sides. Cephalus’ son Polemarchus, who continues the discussion after his father leaves to offer a sacrifice, gives his opinion that the poet Simonides was correct in saying that it was just “to render to each his due” (331e). He explains this statement by defining justice as “treating friends well and enemies badly” (332d). Under the pressure of Socrates’ objections that one may be mistaken in judging others and thus harm good people, Polemarchus modifies his definition to say that justice is “to treat well a friend who is good and to harm an enemy who is bad” (335a). However, when Socrates finally objects that it cannot be just to harm anyone, because justice cannot produce injustice, Polemarchus is completely confused. He agrees with Socrates that justice, which both sides tacitly agree relates to goodness, cannot produce any harm, which can only be caused by injustice. Like his father, he withdraws from the dialogue. The careful reader will note that Socrates does not reject the definition of justice implied in the saying of Simonides, who is called a wise man, namely, that “justice is rendering to each what befits him” (332b), but only its explication given by Polemarchus. This definition is, nevertheless, found unclear.

The first part of Book I of the Republic ends in a negative way, with parties agreeing that none of the definitions provided stands up to examination and that the original question “What is justice?” is more difficult to answer than it seemed to be at the outset. This negative outcome can be seen as a linguistic and philosophical therapy. Firstly, although Socrates’ objections to given definitions can be challenged, it is shown, as it stands, that popular opinions about justice involve inconsistencies. They are inconsistent with other opinions held to be true. The reportive definitions based on everyday usage of the word “justice” help us perhaps to understand partially what justice means, but fail to provide a complete account of what is justice. These definitions have to be supplied by a definition that will assist clarity and establish the meaning of justice. However, to propose such an adequate definition one has to know what justice really is. The way people define a given word is largely determined by the beliefs which they hold about the thing referred to by this word. A definition that is merely arbitrary or either too narrow or too broad, based on a false belief about justice, does not give the possibility of communication. Platonic dialogues are expressions of the ultimate communication that can take place between humans; and true communication is likely to take place only if individuals can share meanings of the words they use. Communication based on false beliefs, such as statements of ideology, is still possible, but seems limited, dividing people into factions, and, as history teaches us, can finally lead only to confusion. The definition of justice as “treating friends well and enemies badly” is for Plato not only inadequate because it is too narrow, but also wrong because it is based on a mistaken belief of what justice is, namely, on the belief grounded in factionalism, which Socrates does not associate with the wise ones but with tyrants (336a). Therefore, in the Republic, as well as in other Platonic dialogues, there is a relationship between conceptual analysis and critical evaluation of beliefs. The goals of these conversations are not merely linguistic, to arrive at an adequate verbal definition, but also substantial, to arrive at a right belief. The question “what is justice” is not only about linguistic usage of the word “justice,” but primarily about the thing to which the word refers. The focus of the second part of Book I is no longer clarification of concepts, but evaluation of beliefs.

In Platonic dialogues, rather than telling them what they have to think, Socrates is often getting his interlocutors to tell him what they think. The next stage of the discussion of the meaning of justice is taken over by Thrasymachus, a sophist, who violently and impatiently bursts into the dialogue. In the fifth and fourth century B.C.E., the sophists were paid teachers of rhetoric and other practical skills, mostly non-Athenians, offering courses of instruction and claiming to be best qualified to prepare young men for success in public life. Plato describes the sophists as itinerant individuals, known for their rhetorical abilities, who reject religious beliefs and traditional morality, and he contrasts them with Socrates, who as a teacher would refuse to accept payment and instead of teaching skills would commit himself to a disinterested inquiry into what is true and just. In a contemptuous manner, Thrasymachus asks Socrates to stop talking nonsense and look into the facts. As a clever man of affairs, he gives an answer to the question of “what is justice” by deriving justice from the city’s configuration of power and making it relative to the interests of the dominant social or political group. “Justice is nothing else than the interest of the stronger” (338c). Now, by contrast to what some commentators say, the statement that Thrasymachus offers as an answer to Socrates’ question about justice is not a definition. The careful reader will notice that Thrasymachus identifies justice with either maintenance or observance of law. His statement is an expression of his belief that, in the world imperfect as it is, the ruling element in the city, or as we would say today the dominant political or social group, institutes laws and governs for its own benefit (338d). The democrats make laws in support of democracy; the aristocrats make laws that support the government of the well-born; the propertied make laws that protect their status and keep their businesses going; and so on. This belief implies, firstly, that justice is not a universal moral value but a notion relative to expediency of the dominant status quo group; secondly, that justice is in the exclusive interest of the dominant group; thirdly, that justice is used as a means of oppression and thus is harmful to the powerless; fourthly, that there is neither any common good nor harmony of interests between those who are in a position of power and those who are not. All there is, is a domination by the powerful and privileged over the powerless. The moral language of justice is used merely instrumentally to conceal the interests of the dominant group and to make these interests appear universal. The powerful “declare what they have made - what is to their own advantage - to be just” (338e). The arrogance with which Thrasymachus makes his statements suggests that he strongly believes that to hold a different view from his own would be to mislead oneself about the world as it is.

After presenting his statement, Thrasymachus intends to leave as if he believed that what he said was so compelling that no further debate about justice was ever possible (344d). In the Republic he exemplifies the power of a dogma. Indeed he presents Socrates with a powerful challenge. Yet, whether or not what he said sounds attractive to anyone, Socrates is not convinced by the statement of his beliefs. Beliefs shape our lives as individuals, nations, ages, and civilizations. Should we really believe that “justice [obeying laws] is really the good of another, the advantage of the stronger and the ruler, harmful to the one who obeys, while injustice [disobeying laws] is in one’s own advantage” (343c)? The discussion between Socrates and his interlocutors is no longer about the meaning of “justice.” It is about fundamental beliefs and “concerns no ordinary topic but the way we ought to live” (352d). Although in Book I Socrates finally succeeds in showing Thrasymachus that his position is self-contradictory and Thrasymachus withdraws from the dialogue, perhaps not fully convinced, yet red-faced, in Book II Thrasymachus’ argument is taken over by two young intellectuals, Plato’s brothers, Glaucon and Adeimantus, who for the sake of curiosity and a playful intellectual exercise push it to the limit (358c-366d). Thrasymachus withdraws, but his statement: moral skepticism and relativism, predominance of power in human relations, and non-existence of the harmony of interests, hovers over the Western mind. It takes whole generations of thinkers to struggle with Thrasymachus’ beliefs, and the debate still continues. It takes the whole remainder of the Republic to present an argument in defense of justice as a universal value and the foundation of the best political order.

4. The Best Political Order

Although large parts of the Republic are devoted to the description of an ideal state ruled by philosophers and its subsequent decline, the chief theme of the dialogue is justice. It is fairly clear that Plato does not introduce his fantastical political innovation, which Socrates describes as a city in speech, a model in heaven, for the purpose of practical implementation (592a-b). The vision of the ideal state is used rather to illustrate the main thesis of the dialogue that justice, understood traditionally as virtue and related to goodness, is the foundation of a good political order, and as such is in everyone’s interest. Justice, if rightly understood, Plato argues, is not to the exclusive advantage of any of the city’s factions, but is concerned with the common good of the whole political community, and is to the advantage of everyone. It provides the city with a sense of unity, and thus, is a basic condition for its health. “Injustice causes civil war, hatred, and fighting, while justice brings friendship and a sense of common purpose” (351d). In order to understand further what justice and political order are for Plato, it is useful to compare his political philosophy with the pre-philosophical insights of Solon, who is referred to in a few dialogues. Biographical information about Plato is fairly scarce. The fact that he was related through his mother to this famous Athenian legislator, statesman and poet, regarded as one of the “Seven Sages,” may be treated as merely incidental. On the other hand, taking into consideration that in Plato’s times education would have been passed on to children informally at home, it seems highly probable that Plato was not only well acquainted with the deeds and ideas of Solon, but that these deeply influenced him.

The essence of the constitutional reform which Solon made in 593 B.C.E., over one hundred and fifty years before Plato’s birth, when he became the Athenian leader, was the restoration of righteous order, eunomia. In the early part of the sixth century Athens was disturbed by a great tension between two parties: the poor and the rich, and stood at the brink of a fierce civil war. On the one hand, because of an economic crisis, many poorer Athenians were hopelessly falling into debt, and since their loans were often secured by their own persons, thousands of them were put into serfdom. On the other hand, lured by easy profits from loans, the rich stood firmly in defense of private property and their ancient privileges. The partisan strife, which seemed inevitable, would make Athens even more weak economically and defenseless before external enemies. Appointed as a mediator in this conflict, Solon enacted laws prohibiting loans on the security of the person. He lowered the rate of interest, ordered the cancellation of all debts, and gave freedom to serfs. He acted so moderately and impartially that he became unpopular with both parties. The rich felt hurt by the reform. The poor, unable to hold excess in check, demanded a complete redistribution of landed property and the dividing of it into equal shares. Nevertheless, despite these criticisms from both sides, Solon succeeded in gaining social peace. Further, by implementing new constitutional laws, he set up a “mighty shield against both parties and did not allow either to win an unjust victory” (Aristotle, The Athenian Constitution). He introduced a system of checks and balances which would not favor any side, but took into consideration legitimate interests of all social groups. In his position, he could easily have become the tyrant over the city, but he did not seek power for himself. After he completed his reform, he left Athens in order to see whether it would stand the test of time, and returned to his country only ten years later. Even though in 561 Pisistratus seized power and became the first in a succession of Athenian tyrants, and in 461 the democratic leader Ephialtes abolished the checks upon popular sovereignty, Solon’s reform provided the ancient Greeks with a model of both political leadership and order based on impartiality and fairness. Justice for Solon is not an arithmetical equality: giving equal shares to all alike irrespective of merit, which represents the democratic concept of distributive justice, but it is equity or fairness based on difference: giving shares proportionate to the merit of those who receive them. The same ideas of political order, leadership, and justice can be found in Plato’s dialogues.

For Plato, like for Solon, the starting point for the inquiry about the best political order is the fact of social diversity and conflicting interests, which involve the danger of civil strife. The political community consists of different parts or social classes, such as the noble, the rich, and the poor, each representing different values, interests, and claims to rule. This gives rise to the controversy of who should rule the community, and what is the best political system. In both the Republic and the Laws, Plato asserts not only that factionalism and civil war are the greatest dangers to the city, more dangerous even than war against external enemies, but also that peace obtained by the victory of one part and the destruction of its rivals is not to be preferred to social peace obtained through the friendship and cooperation of all the city’s parts (Republic 462a-b, Laws 628a-b). Peace for Plato is, unlike for Marxists and other radical thinkers, not a status quo notion, related to the interest of the privileged group, but a value that most people usually desire. He does not stand for war and the victory of one class, but for peace in social diversity. “The best is neither war nor faction - they are things we should pray to be spared from - but peace and mutual good will” (628c). Building on the pre-philosophical insights of Solon and his concept of balancing conflicting interests, in both the Republic and the Laws, Plato offers two different solutions to the same problem of social peace based on the equilibrium and harmonious union of different social classes. If in the Republic it is the main function of the political leadership of philosopher-rulers to make the civil strife cease, in the Laws this mediating function is taken over by laws. The best political order for Plato is that which promotes social peace in the environment of cooperation and friendship among different social groups, each benefiting from and each adding to the common good. The best form of government, which he advances in the Republic, is a philosophical aristocracy or monarchy, but that which he proposes in his last dialogue the Laws is a traditional polity: the mixed or composite constitution that reconciles different partisan interests and includes aristocratic, oligarchic, and democratic elements.

5. The Government of Philosopher Rulers

It is generally believed today that democracy, “government of the people by the people and for the people,” is the best and only fully justifiable political system. The distinct features of democracy are freedom and equality. Democracy can be described as the rule of the free people who govern themselves, either directly or though their representatives, in their own interest. Why does Plato not consider democracy the best form of government? In the Republic he criticizes the direct and unchecked democracy of his time precisely because of its leading features (557a-564a). Firstly, although freedom is for Plato a true value, democracy involves the danger of excessive freedom, of doing as one likes, which leads to anarchy. Secondly, equality, related to the belief that everyone has the right and equal capacity to rule, brings to politics all kinds of power-seeking individuals, motivated by personal gain rather than public good. Democracy is thus highly corruptible. It opens gates to demagogues, potential dictators, and can thus lead to tyranny. Hence, although it may not be applicable to modern liberal democracies, Plato’s main charge against the democracy he knows from the ancient Greek political practice is that it is unstable, leading from anarchy to tyranny, and that it lacks leaders with proper skill and morals. Democracy depends on chance and must be mixed with competent leadership (501b). Without able and virtuous leaders, such as Solon or Pericles, who come and go by chance, it is not a good form of government. But even Pericles, who as Socrates says made people “wilder” rather than more virtuous, is considered not to be the best leader (Gorgias, 516c). If ruling a state is a craft, indeed statecraft, Plato argues, then politics needs expert rulers, and they cannot come to it merely by accident, but must be carefully selected and prepared in the course of extensive training. Making political decisions requires good judgment. Politics needs competence, at least in the form of today’s civil servants. Who then should the experts be and why? Why does Plato in the Republic decide to hand the steering wheel of the state to philosophers?

In spite of the idealism with which he is usually associated, Plato is not politically naive. He does not idealize, but is deeply pessimistic about human beings. Most people, corrupted as they are, are for him fundamentally irrational, driven by their appetites, egoistic passions, and informed by false beliefs. If they choose to be just and obey laws, it is only because they lack the power to act criminally and are afraid of punishment (Republic, 359a). Nevertheless, human beings are not vicious by nature. They are social animals, incapable of living alone (369a-b). Living in communities and exchanging products of their labor is natural for them, so that they have capacities for rationality and goodness. Plato, as later Rousseau, believes that once political society is properly ordered, it can contribute to the restoration of morals. A good political order, good education and upbringing can produce “good natures; and [these] useful natures, who are in turn well educated, grow up even better than their predecessors” (424a). Hence, there are in Plato such elements of the idealistic or liberal world view as the belief in education and progress, and a hope for a better future. The quality of human life can be improved if people learn to be rational and understand that their real interests lie in harmonious cooperation with one another, and not in war or partisan strife. However, unlike Rousseau, Plato does not see the best social and political order in a democratic republic. Opinions overcome truth in everyday life. Peoples’ lives and the lives of communities are shaped by the prevailing beliefs. If philosophers are those who can distinguish between true and false beliefs, who love knowledge and are motivated by the common good, and finally if they are not only master-theoreticians, but also the master-practitioners who can heal the ills of their society, then they, and not democratically elected representatives, must be chosen as leaders and educators of the political community and guide it to proper ends. They are required to counteract the destabilizing effects of false beliefs on society. Are philosophers incorruptible? In the ideal city there are provisions to minimize possible corruption, even among the good-loving philosophers. They can neither enjoy private property nor family life. Although they are the rulers, they receive only a modest remuneration from the state, dine in common dining halls, and have wives and children in common. These provisions are necessary, Plato believes, because if the philosopher-rulers were to acquire private land, luxurious homes, and money themselves, they would soon become hostile masters of other citizens rather than their leaders and allies (417a-b). The ideal city becomes a bad one, described as timocracy, precisely when the philosophers neglect music and physical exercise, and begin to gather wealth (547b).

To be sure, Plato’s philosophers, among whom he includes both men and women, are not those who can usually be found today in departments of philosophy and who are described as the “prisoners who take refuge in a temple” (495a). Initially chosen from among the brightest, most stable, and most courageous children, they go through a sophisticated and prolonged educational training which begins with gymnastics, music and mathematics, and ends with dialectic, military service and practical city management. They have superior theoretical knowledge, including the knowledge of the just, noble, good and advantageous, but are not inferior to others in practical matters as well (484d, 539e). Being in the final stage of their education illuminated by the idea of the good, they are those who can see beyond changing empirical phenomena and reflect on such timeless values as justice, beauty, truth, and moderation (501b, 517b). Goodness is not merely a theoretical idea for them, but the ultimate state of their mind. If the life of the philosopher-rulers is not of private property, family or wealth, nor even of honor, and if the intellectual life itself seems so attractive, why should they then agree to rule? Plato’s answer is in a sense a negative one. Philosophical life, based on contemplative leisure and the pleasure of learning, is indeed better and happier than that of ruling the state (519d). However, the underlying idea is not to make any social class in the city the victorious one and make it thus happy, but “to spread happiness throughout the city by bringing the citizens into harmony with each other ... and by making them share with each other the benefits that each class can confer on the community” (519e). Plato assumes that a city in which the rulers do not govern out of desire for private gain, but are least motivated by personal ambition, is governed in the way which is the finest and freest from civil strife (520d). Philosophers will rule not only because they will be best prepared for this, but also because if they do not, the city will no longer be well governed and may fall prey to economic decline, factionalism, and civil war. They will approach ruling not as something really enjoyable, but as something necessary (347c-d).

Objections against the government of philosopher-rulers can be made. Firstly, because of the restrictions concerning family and private property, Plato is often accused of totalitarianism. However, Plato’s political vision differs from a totalitarian state in a number of important aspects. Especially in the Laws he makes clear that freedom is one of the main values of society (701d). Other values for which Plato stands include justice, friendship, wisdom, courage, and moderation, and not factionalism or terror that can be associated with a totalitarian state. The restrictions which he proposes are placed on the governors, rather than on the governed. Secondly, one can argue that there may obviously be a danger in the self-professed claim to rule of the philosophers. Individuals may imagine themselves to be best qualified to govern a country, but in fact they may lose contact with political realities and not be good leaders at all. If philosopher-rulers did not have real knowledge of their city, they would be deprived of the essential credential that is required to make their rule legitimate, namely, that they alone know how best to govern. Indeed, at the end of Book VII of the Republic where philosophers’ education is discussed, Socrates says: “I forgot that we were only playing, and so I spoke too vehemently” (536b), as if to imply that objections can be made to philosophical rule. As in a few other places in the dialogue, Plato throws his political innovation open to doubt. However, in Plato’s view, philosopher-rulers do not derive their authority solely from their expert knowledge, but also from their love of the city as a whole and their impartiality and fairness. Their political authority is not only rational but also substantially moral, based on the consent of the governed. They regard justice as the most important and most essential thing (540e). Even if particular political solutions presented in the Republic may be open to questioning, what seems to stand firm is the basic idea that underlies philosophers’ governance and that can be traced back to Solon: the idea of fairness based on difference as the basis of the righteous political order. A political order based on fairness leads to friendship and cooperation among different parts of the city.

For Plato, as for Solon, government exists for the benefit of all citizens and all social classes, and must mediate between potentially conflicting interests. Such a mediating force is exercised in the ideal city of the Republic by the philosopher-rulers. They are the guarantors of the political order that is encapsulated in the norm that regulates just relations of persons and classes within the city and is expressed by the phrase: “doing one’s own work and not meddling with what isn’t one’s own” (433a-b). If justice is related to equality, the notion of equality is indeed preserved in Plato’s view of justice expressed by this norm as the impartial, equal treatment of all citizens and social groups. It is not the case that Plato knew that his justice meant equality but really made inequality, as Karl Popper (one of his major critics) believed. In the ideal city all persons and social groups are given equal opportunities to be happy, that is, to pursue happiness, but not at the expense of others. Their particular individual, group or class happiness is limited by the need of the happiness for all. The happiness of the whole city is not for Plato the happiness of an abstract unity called the polis, or the happiness of the greatest number, but rather the happiness of all citizens derived from a peaceful, harmonious, and cooperative union of different social classes. According to the traditional definition of justice by Simonides from Book I, which is reinterpreted in Book IV, as “doing one’s own work,” each social class receives its proper due in the distribution of benefits and burdens. The philosopher-rulers enjoy respect and contemplative leisure, but not wealth or honors; the guardian class, the second class in the city, military honors, but not leisure or wealth; and the producer class, family life, wealth, and freedom of enterprise, but not honors or rule. Then, the producers supply the city with goods; the guardians, defend it; and the philosophers, attuned to virtue and illuminated by goodness, rule it impartially for the common benefit of all citizens. The three different social classes engage in mutually beneficial enterprise, by which the interests of all are best served. Social and economic differences, i.e. departures from equality, bring about benefits to people in all social positions, and therefore, are justified. In the Platonic vision of the Republic, all social classes get to perform what they are best fit to do and are unified into a single community by mutual interests. In this sense, although each are different, they are all friends.

6. Politics and the Soul

It can be contended that the whole argument of the Republic is made in response to the denial of justice as a universal moral value expressed in Thrasymachus’ statement: “Justice is nothing else than the interest of the stronger.” Moral relativism, the denial of the harmony of interests, and other problems posed by this statement are a real challenge for Plato for whom justice is not merely a notion relative to the existing laws instituted by the victorious factions in power. In the Laws a similar statement is made again (714c), and it is interpreted as the right of the strong, the winner in a political battle (715a). By such interpretation, morality is denied and the right to govern, like in the “Melian Dialogue” of Thucydides, is equated simply with might. The decisions about morals and justice which we make are for Plato “no trifle, but the foremost thing” (714b). The answer to the question of what is right and what is wrong can entirely determine our way of life, as individuals and communities. If Plato’s argument about justice presented in both the Republic and the Laws can be summarized in just one sentence, the sentence will say: “Justice is neither the right of the strong nor the advantage of the stronger, but the right of the best and the advantage of the whole community.” The best, as explained in the Republic, are the expert philosophical rulers. They, the wise and virtuous, free from faction and guided by the idea of the common good, should rule for the common benefit of the whole community, so that the city will not be internally divided by strife, but one in friendship (Republic, 462a-b). Then, in the Laws, the reign of the best individuals is replaced by the reign of the finest laws instituted by a judicious legislator (715c-d). Throughout this dialogue Plato’s guiding principle is that the good society is a harmonious union of different social elements that represent two key values: wisdom and freedom (701d). The best laws assure that all the city’s parts: the democratic, the oligarchic, and the aristocratic, are represented in political institutions: the popular Assembly, the elected Council, and the Higher Council, and thus each social class receives its due expression. Still, a democratic skeptic can feel dissatisfied with Plato’s proposal to grant the right to rule to the best, either individuals or laws, even on the basis of tacit consent of the governed. The skeptic may believe that every adult is capable of exercising the power of self-direction, and should be given the opportunity to do so. He will be prepared to pay the costs of eventual mistakes and to endure an occasional civil unrest or even a limited war rather than be directed by anyone who may claim superior wisdom. Why then should Plato’s best constitution be preferable to democracy? In order to fully explain the Platonic political vision, the meaning of “the best” should be further clarified.

In the short dialogue Alcibiades I, little studied today and thought by some scholars as not genuine, though held in great esteem by the Platonists of antiquity, Socrates speaks with Alcibiades. The subject of their conversation is politics. Frequently referred to by Thucydides in the History of the Peloponnesian War, Alcibiades, the future leader of Athens, highly intelligent and ambitious, largely responsible for the Athenian invasion of Sicily, is at the time of conversation barely twenty years old. The young, handsome, and well-born Alcibiades of the dialogue is about to begin his political career and to address the Assembly for the first time (105a-b). He plans to advise the Athenians on the subject of peace and war, or some other important affair (107d). His ambitions are indeed extraordinary. He does not want just to display his worth before the people of Athens and become their leader, but to rule over Europe and Asia as well (105c). His dreams resemble that of the future Alexander the Great. His claim to rule is that he is the best. However, upon Socrates’ scrutiny, it becomes apparent that young Alcibiades knows neither what is just, nor what is advantageous, nor what is good, nor what is noble, beyond what he has learned from the crowd (110d-e, 117a). His world-view is based on unexamined opinions. He appears to be the worst type of ignorant person who pretends that he knows something but does not. Such ignorance in politics is the cause of mistakes and evils (118a). What is implied in the dialogue is that noble birth, beautiful looks, and even intelligence and power, without knowledge, do not give the title to rule. Ignorance, the condition of Alcibiades, is also the condition of the great majority of the people (118b-c). Nevertheless, Socrates promises to guide Alcibiades, so that he becomes excellent and renowned among the Greeks (124b-c). In the course of further conversation, it turns out that one who is truly the best does not only have knowledge of political things, rather than an opinion about them, but also knows one’s own self and is a beautiful soul. He or she is perfect in virtue. The riches of the world can be entrusted only to those who “take trouble over” themselves (128d), who look “toward what is divine and bright” (134d), and who following the supreme soul, God, the finest mirror of their own image (133c), strive to be as beautiful and wealthy in their souls as possible (123e, 131d). The best government can be founded only on beautiful and well-ordered souls.

In a few dialogues, such as Phaedo, the Republic, Phaedrus, Timaeus, and the Laws, Plato introduces his doctrine of the immortality of the soul. His ultimate answer to the question “Who am I?” is not an “egoistic animal” or an “independent variable,” as the twentieth century behavioral researcher blatantly might say, but an “immortal soul, corrupted by vice and purified by virtue, of whom the body is only an instrument” (129a-130c). Expert political knowledge for him should include not only knowledge of things out there, but also knowledge of oneself. This is because whoever is ignorant of himself will also be ignorant of others and of political things, and, therefore, will never be an expert politician (133e). Those who are ignorant will go wrong, moving from one misery to another (134a). For them history will be a tough teacher, but as long they do not recognize themselves and practice virtue, they will learn nothing. Plato’s good society is impossible without transcendence, without a link to the perfect being who is God, the true measure of all things. It is also impossible without an ongoing philosophical reflection on whom we truly are. Therefore, democracy would not be a good form of government for him unless, as it is proposed in the Laws, the element of freedom is mixed with the element of wisdom, which includes ultimate knowledge of the self. Unmixed and unchecked democracy, marked by the general permissiveness that spurs vices, makes people impious, and lets them forget about their true self, is only be the second worst in the rank of flawed regimes after tyranny headed by a vicious individual. This does not mean that Plato would support a theocratic government based on shallow religiosity and religious hypocrisy. There is no evidence for this. Freedom of speech, forming opinions and expressing them, which may be denied in theocracy, is a true value for Plato, along with wisdom. It is the basic requirement for philosophy. In shallow religiosity, like in atheism, there is ignorance and no knowledge of the self either. In Book II of the Republic, Plato criticizes the popular religious beliefs of the Athenians, who under the influence of Homer and Hesiod attribute vices to the gods and heroes (377d-383c). He tries to show that God is the perfect being, the purest and brightest, always the same, immortal and true, to whom we should look in order to know ourselves and become pure and virtuous (585b-e). God, and not human beings, is the measure of political order (Laws, 716c).

7. Plato’s Achievement

Plato’s greatest achievement may be seen firstly in that he, in opposing the sophists, offered to decadent Athens, which had lost faith in her old religion, traditions, and customs, a means by which civilization and the city’s health could be restored: the recovery of order in both the polis and the soul.

The best, rational and righteous political order leads to the harmonious unity of a society and allows all the city’s parts to pursue happiness but not at the expense of others. The characteristics of a good political society, of which most people can say “it is mine” (462c), are described in the Republic by four virtues: justice, wisdom, moderation, and courage. Justice is the equity or fairness that grants each social group its due and ensures that each “does one’s own work” (433a). The three other virtues describe qualities of different social groups. Wisdom, which can be understood as the knowledge of the whole, including both knowledge of the self and political prudence, is the quality of the leadership (428e-429a). Courage is not merely military courage but primarily civic courage: the ability to preserve the right, law-inspired belief, and stand in defense of such values as friendship and freedom on which a good society is founded. It is the primary quality of the guardians (430b). Finally, moderation, a sense of the limits that bring peace and happiness to all, is the quality of all social classes. It expresses the mutual consent of both the governed and the rulers as to who should rule (431d-432a). The four virtues of the good society describe also the soul of a well-ordered individual. Its rational part, whose quality is wisdom, nurtured by fine words and learning, should together with the emotional or spirited part, cultivated by music and rhythm, rule over the volitional or appetitive part (442a). Under the leadership of the intellect, the soul must free itself from greed, lust, and other degrading vices, and direct itself to the divine. The liberation of the soul from vice is for Plato the ultimate task of humans on earth. Nobody can be wicked and happy (580a-c). Only a spiritually liberated individual, whose soul is beautiful and well ordered, can experience true happiness. Only a country ordered according to the principles of virtue can claim to have the best system of government.

Plato’s critique of democracy may be considered by modern readers as not applicable to liberal democracy today. Liberal democracies are not only founded on considerations of freedom and equality, but also include other elements, such as the rule of law, multiparty systems, periodic elections, and a professional civil service. Organized along the principle of separation of powers, today’s Western democracy resembles more a revised version of mixed government, with a degree of moderation and competence, rather than the highly unstable and unchecked Athenian democracy of the fourth and fifth century B.C.E., in which all governmental policies were directly determined by the often changing moods of the people. However, what still seems to be relevant in Plato’s political philosophy is that he reminds us of the moral and spiritual dimension of political life. He believes that virtue is the lifeblood of any good society.

Moved by extreme ambitions, the Athenians, like the mythological Atlantians described in the dialogue Critias, became infected by “wicked coveting and the pride of power” (121b). Like the drunken Alcibiades from the Symposium, who would swap “bronze for gold” and thus prove that he did not understand the Socratic teaching, they chose the “semblance of beauty,” the shining appearance of power and material wealth, rather than the “thing itself,” the being of perfection (Symposium, 218e). “To the seen eye they now began to seem foul, for they were losing the fairest bloom from their precious treasure, but to such who could not see the truly happy life, they would appear fair and blessed” (Critias, 121b). They were losing their virtuous souls, their virtue by which they could prove themselves to be worthy of preservation as a great nation. Racked by the selfish passions of greed and envy, they forfeited their conception of the right order. Their benevolence, the desire to do good, ceased. “Man and city are alike,” Plato claims (Republic, 577d). Humans without souls are hollow. Cities without virtue are rotten. To those who cannot see clearly they may look glorious but what appears bright is only exterior. To see clearly what is visible, the political world out there, Plato argues, one has first to perceive what is invisible but intelligible, the soul. One has to know oneself. Humans are immortal souls, he claims, and not just independent variables. They are often egoistic, but the divine element in them makes them more than mere animals. Friendship, freedom, justice, wisdom, courage, and moderation are the key values that define a good society based on virtue, which must be guarded against vice, war, and factionalism. To enjoy true happiness, humans must remain virtuous and remember God, the perfect being.

Plato’s achievement as a political philosopher may be seen in that he believed that there could be a body of knowledge whose attainment would make it possible to heal political problems, such as factionalism and the corruption of morals, which can bring a city to a decline. The doctrine of the harmony of interests, fairness as the basis of the best political order, the mixed constitution, the rule of law, the distinction between good and deviated forms of government, practical wisdom as the quality of good leadership, and the importance of virtue and transcendence for politics are the political ideas that can rightly be associated with Plato. They have profoundly influenced subsequent political thinkers.

Author Information

W. J. Korab-Karpowicz
Anglo-American University of Prague
Czech Republic

Pascal's Wager about God

Pascal-imgBlaise Pascal (1623-1662) offers a pragmatic reason for believing in God: even under the assumption that God’s existence is unlikely, the potential benefits of believing are so vast as to make betting on theism rational. The super-dominance form of the argument conveys the basic Pascalian idea, the expectations argument refines it, and the dominating expectations argument gives a more sophisticated version still.

Critics in turn have raised a number of now-classic challenges. (i) According to intellectualism, deliberately choosing which beliefs to hold is practically impossible. Intellectualism, however, appears to be not only questionable but irrelevant. (ii) According to the many-gods objection, Pascal’s wager begs the question and hence is irrational. It assumes that if God exists then God must take a rather specific form, which few open-minded agnostics would accept. Pascalians reply by invoking the notion of a genuine option (which is not defined), by devising run-off decision theory (which is not justified), by claiming that Pascal was understandably unaware of other cultures (which is not true), and by appealing to generic theism (which does not solve the problem).

(iii) According to evidentialism, Pascalian reasoning is epistemically irresponsible and hence immoral. One development of this argument, suggesting that God is an evidentialist, amounts to a variant of the many-gods objection. Another development, suggesting that we should be evidentialists, hinges on the outcome of larger moral theory. (iv) According to various paradoxes, reference to infinite values is decision-theoretic non-sense.

Table of Contents

  1. A Reason for Believing in God
    1. The Super-Dominance Argument
    2. The Expectations Argument
    3. The Dominating Expectations Argument
  2. The Intellectualist Objection: Is Belief a Matter of Choice?
  3. The Many-Gods Objection: Do Rival Religious Options Undermine Each Other?
    1. Genuine Options
    2. Run-off Decision Theory
    3. Relativism
    4. Generic Theism
  4. The Evidentialist Objection: Is Prudential Reasoning Ethical?
  5. The Paradox Objection: Is Decision Theory Coherent?
    1. The Equi-utility Paradox
    2. The St. Petersburg Paradox
  6. References and Further Reading

1. A Reason for Believing in God

There are two kinds of argument for theism. Traditional, epistemic arguments hold that God exists; examples include arguments from cosmology, design, ontology, and experience. Modern, pragmatic arguments hold that, regardless of whether God exists, believing in God is good for us, or is the right thing to do; examples include William James's will to believe and Blaise Pascal's wager.

Pascal -- French philosopher, scientist, mathematician and probability theorist (1623-1662) -- argues that if we do not know whether God exists then we should play it safe rather than risk being sorry. The argument comes in three versions (Hacking 1972), all of them employing decision theory.

For those who are unfamiliar with decision theory, the idea can be illustrated by considering a lottery. Suppose there are 100 tickets at $1 each and a jackpot of $1000. Is it rational to play? If you total the earnings and the expenses for all the tickets ($1000 - $100), then divide by the number of tickets, you find that on average each ticket nets $9. In comparison, not playing involves zero expense and zero payoff. Since $9 is preferable to $0, it is rational to play. Alternately, suppose there are 1000 tickets costing $2 each, a grand prize of $1000, and a consolation prize of $500. Then the total earnings and expenses ($1500 - $2000), divided by the number of tickets, yields a net loss of fifty cents for the average ticket. In this case, unless you have some reason to believe that a given ticket is not average, playing the game is irrational.

To put the matter more generally: a given action (say, buying a ticket) is associated with a set of possible outcomes (say, winning the grand prize, winning the consolation prize, or losing); each outcome has a certain value or "utility" (the utility of winning might be the value of the prize minus the cost of the ticket); the "expectation" for each outcome is equal to its utility multiplied by the probability of its happening; the expectation for a given action is the sum of the expectations for each possible associated outcome. The course of action having the maximum expectation is the rational one to follow.

a. The Super-Dominance Argument

Pascal begins with a two-by-two matrix: either God exists or does not, and either you believe or do not.

--Table I-- God exists God does not exist
You believe in God (a) infinite reward (c) 250 utiles
You do not believe in God (b) infinite punishment (d) 200 utiles

If God exists then theists will enjoy eternal bliss (cell a), while atheists will suffer eternal damnation (cell b). If God does not exist then theists will enjoy finite happiness before they die (say 250 units worth), and atheists will enjoy finite happiness too, though not so much because they will experience angst rather than the comforts of religion. Regardless of whether God exists, then, theists have it better than atheists; hence belief in God is the most rational belief to have.

b. The Expectations Argument

What if the atheist is a happy hedonist, or if the theist is a miserable puritan? In that case the value of cell (d) is greater than that of (c), and the dominance argument no longer works. However, if there is a 50-50 chance that God exists then we can calculate the expectations as follows:

--Table II-- God exists God does not exist
You believe in God +infinity something finite
You do not believe in God -infinity something finite

Using the table, the expectation for believing in God = (positive infinity x ½) + (a finite value x ½) = positive infinity; and the expectation for not believing = (negative infinity x ½) + (a finite value x ½) = negative infinity. Hence it is rational to believe in God.

c. The Dominating Expectations Argument

It’s unlikely that the probability of God’s existing is exactly one-half, but this does not matter. Due to the infinite value in cell (a), if God’s existence has any finite probability then the expectation for believing in God will be infinite. Furthermore, this infinity will swamp the values in cells (b), (c), and (d), so long as (c) is not infinitely negative and neither (b) nor (d) is infinitely positive.

2. The Intellectualist Objection: Is Belief a Matter of Choice?

According to doxastic voluntarism, believing and disbelieving are choices that are up to us to make. Intellectualists deny this; they say it is impossible to adopt a belief simply because we decide to. If I offered to pay you $1000 for believing the sky is green, for instance, could you sincerely adopt this belief simply by wishing to? Evidently not. Therefore, some say, Pascal's wager does not give legitimate grounds for believing in God.

But although we cannot adopt a belief simply by deciding to, the same is true for other actions. For instance, we cannot go to school simply by deciding to; rather, we have to wake up by a certain time (which may mean first developing a certain kind of habit), we must get dressed, we must put one foot in front of another, and so forth. Then if we are lucky we will end up at our destination, though this is far from guaranteed. So it goes for any other endeavor in life: one chooses to become a doctor, or to marry by age 30, or to live in the tropics -- the attainment of such goals can be facilitated, though not purely willed, by appropriate micro-steps that are more nearly under voluntary control. Indeed, even twitching your little finger is not entirely a matter of volition, as its success depends on a functioning neural system running from your brain, through your spine, and down your arm. Your minutest action is a joint product of internal volition and external contingencies. The same applies to theistic belief: although you cannot simply decide to be a theist, you can choose to read one-sided literature, you can choose to join a highly religious community, you can try to induce mystical experiences by ingesting psychedelic drugs like LSD, and you can choose to chant and pray. No mere exercise of will can guarantee that you will end up believing in God, but neither can any exercise of will guarantee that you succeed in doing anything else you decide to do. If there is a difference between our ability to voluntarily believe something and our ability to voluntarily wiggle our toe, it is a difference in degree of likely success, and not a difference in logical kind.

Yet a difference in degree may be significant, and it is worth noting that theists and atheists may disagree on the power of prayer to change one’s beliefs. Theists generally think that prayer tends to bring one into contact with God, in which case one is likely to notice, recognize, and believe in God’s existence. Atheists, on the other hand, have no particular reason to think that mere praying should notably effect conversion. An agnostic would do well then to try; for it would be precisely in the case where success matters that trying is likely to be most efficacious.

Indeed, it might not matter whether we can choose to have the beliefs we have. If Tables I or II be right then the fact would remain that it is pragmatically better to believe in God than not, insofar as theists, taken across all possible worlds, are on average better off than atheists. It does not matter whether theism results from personal will-power, God's grace, or cosmic luck -- regardless, being better off is being better off. Thus, Pascal’s wager need not succeed as a tool of persuasion for it to serve as a tool of assessment (Mougin & Sober 1994).

3. The Many-Gods Objection: Do Rival Religious Options Undermine Each Other?

Pascal's compatriot Denis Diderot replied to the wager that an ayatollah or "imam could just as well reason the same way." His point is that decision theory cannot decide among the various religions practiced in the world; it gives no warrant for believing in Pascal's Catholicism, or even in a generic Judeo-Christianity. The reason is that Tables I and II beg the question in favor of a certain kind of theism; a more complete matrix must consider at least the following possibilities.

--Table III-- Yahweh exists Allah exists
You worship Yahweh infinite reward infinite punishment
You worship Allah infinite punishment infinite reward

In reply, Pascalians offer a number of defenses.

a. Genuine Options

Some Pascalians insist that only certain theological possibilities count as "genuine options" (James 1897, Jordan 1994b), although this notion is never clearly defined. Perhaps a proposition P is a genuine option for some subject S only if S is likely to succeed in believing P, should S choose to. However, the relevance of volition is questionable, as discussed in the previous section. Alternatively, perhaps P is a genuine option for S unless P strikes S as "bizarre" or untraditional (Jordan 1994b). The difficulty here lies in distinguishing this position from emotional prejudice (Saka 2001). Finally, it may be that a genuine option is one that possesses sufficient evidential support, in which case it can then participate in a run-off decision procedure.

b. Run-off Decision Theory

Some Pascalians propose combining pragmatic and epistemic factors in a two-stage process. First, one uses epistemic considerations in selecting a limited set of belief options, then one uses prudential considerations in choosing among them (Jordan 1994b). Alternatively, one first uses prudential considerations to choose religion over non-religion, and then uses epistemic considerations to choose a particular religion (Schlesinger 1994, Jordan 1993).

In order to be at all plausible, this approach must answer two questions. First, what is the justification for deliberately excluding some possibilities, no matter how improbable, from prudential reasoning? It seems irrational to dismiss some options that are acknowledged to be possible, even be they unlikely, so long as the stakes are sufficiently high (Sorensen 1994). Second, can epistemic considerations work without begging the question? Schlesinger argues that the Principle of Sufficient Reason gives some support for believing in God, but in a Pascalian context this is questionable. If you subscribe to a suitable form of the Principle of Sufficient Reason (one that leads to a given kind of theism), you are likely to be a theist already and hence Pascal’s wager does not apply to you; on the other hand, if you do not believe in the right kind of Principle of Sufficient Reason, then you will not think that it makes theism more probable than atheistic Buddhism, or anthropomorphic theism more probable than deism. Other epistemic considerations, such as Schlesinger’s appeal to testimony, simplicity, and sublimity, meet with analogous challenges (Amico 1994, Saka 2001).

c. Relativism

Some Pascalians, while acknowledging that the Wager might be unsound for today’s multi-culturally sophisticated audience, maintain that the Wager is sound relative to Pascal and his peers in the 1600s, when Catholicism and agnosticism were the only possibilities (Rescher 1985, Franklin 1998). But the Crusades in the 1100s taught the French of Islam, the Renaissance in the 1400s taught the French of Greco-Roman paganism, the discoveries of the 1500s taught the French of new-world paganism, and several wars of religion taught the French of Protestantism. To claim that the educated French of the 1600s rightfully rejected alien beliefs without consideration appears to endorse rank prejudice.

d. Generic Theism

Some acknowledge that Pascal's wager cannot decide among religions, yet maintain that "it at least gets us to theism" (Jordan 1994b, Armour-Garb 1999). The idea is that Catholics, Protestants, Jews, Moslems, and devil-worshippers can all legitimately use decision theory to conclude that it is best to believe in some supreme being. Against this there are two objections. First, it disregards theological possibilities such as the Professor's God. The Professor's God rewards those who humbly remain skeptical in the absence of evidence, and punishes those who adopt theism on the basis of self-interest (Martin 1975, 1990; Mackie 1982). Second, the claim that Pascal’s wager yields generic theism assumes that all religions are theistic. But consider the following sort of atheistic Buddhism: if you clear your mind then you will attain nirvana and otherwise you will not -- that is, if you fill your mind with thoughts and desires, such as believing that God exists or living God, then you will not attain salvation (Saka 2001).

4. The Evidentialist Objection: Is Prudential Reasoning Ethical

There are two versions of this objection that need to be kept distinct. The first one suggests that Pascalian reasoners are manipulative egoists whom God might take exception to, and they won’t be rewarded after all (Nicholl 1978). Schlesinger 1994 responds by saying that any reasoning that gets us to believe in God, if God exists, cannot be bad. But this argument seems to depend on the nature of God. If God holds that results are all that matter, that the ends justify the means, then Schlesinger is right. But maybe God holds that true beliefs count as meritorious only if they are based on good evidence; maybe God rewards only evidentialists. In short, this form of the objection is just another version of the many-gods objection.

Another form of evidentialism refers not to God's character but to our own. Regardless of how God might or might not reward our decisions, it may be categorically, epistemically or otherwise wrong -- "absolutely wicked", in the words of G.E. Moore -- for us to base any belief on decision-theoretic self-interest (Clifford 1879, Nicholls 1978).

Since utilitarians would tend to favor Pascalian reasoning while Kantians and virtue ethicists would not, the issue at stake belongs to a much larger debate in moral philosophy.

5. The Paradox Objection: Is Decision Theory Coherent?

a. The Equi-utility Paradox

If you regularly brush your teeth, there is some chance you will go to heaven and enjoy infinite bliss. On the other hand, there is some chance you will enjoy infinite heavenly bliss even if you do not brush your teeth. Therefore the expectation of brushing your teeth (infinity plus a little extra due to oral health = infinity) is the same as that of not brushing your teeth (infinity minus a bit due to cavities and gingivitis = infinity), from which it follows that dental hygiene is not a particularly prudent course of action. In fact, as soon as we allow infinite utilities, decision theory tells us that any course of action is as good as any other (Duff 1986). Hence we have a reductio ad absurdum against decision theory, at least when it’s extended to infinite cases. In reply to such difficulties, Jordan 1993 proposes a run-off decision theory as described above.

b. The St. Petersburg Paradox

Imagine tossing a coin until it lands heads-up, and suppose that the payoff grows exponentially according to the number of tosses you make. If the coin lands heads-up on the first toss then the payoff is $2; if it takes two tosses then the payoff is $4; if it takes three tosses then the payoff is $8; and so forth, ad infinitum. Now the odds of the game ending on the first toss is 1/2; of ending on the second toss, 1/4; on the third, 1/8; and so forth. Since there is a one-half chance of winning $2, plus a quarter chance of winning $4, plus a one-eighth chance of winning $8, and so forth, your expectation for playing the game is (1/2 x $2) + (1/4 x $4) + (1/8 x $8) +…, that is, $1 + $1 + $1… = infinity! It follows you should be willing to pay any finite amount for the privilege of playing this game. Yet it clearly seems irrational to pay very much at all. The conclusion is that decision theory is a bad guide when infinite values are involved (for discussion of this very old paradox, see Sorensen 1994). Byl (1994) points out that instead of referring to infinite payoffs we can speak of arbitrarily high ones. No matter how improbable be the existence of God, it is still decision-theoretically rational to believe in God if the reward for doing so is sufficiently, yet only finitely, high. However, this does not address the heart of the problem, for the St. Petersburg paradox too may be cast in terms of an arbitrarily high limit. Intuitively, one would not be willing to pay a million dollars, say, for the privilege of playing a game capped at one-million-and-one coin tosses, and it is not just because of the diminishing value of money. There is something unsettling about decision theory, at least as applied to extreme cases, and so we might be skeptical about using it as a basis for religious commitment.

6. References and Further Reading

The best known defense of Pascal is Lycan & Schlesinger 1989; for responses see Amico 1994 and Saka 2001. A good sourcebook is Jordan 1994a.

  • Amico, Robert (1994) "Pascal’s wager revisited", International Studies in Philosophy 26:1-11.
  • Armour-Garb, Bradley (1999) "Betting on God", Religious Studies 35:119-38.
  • Byl, John (1994) "On Pascal’s wager and infinite utilities", Faith & Philosophy 11:467-73.
  • Clifford, William (1879) "The ethics of belief", Lectures & Essays, Macmillan.
  • Duff, Anthony (1986) "Pascal’s wager and infinite utilities", Analysis 46:107-09.
  • Franklin, James (1998) "Two caricatures, I: Pascal’s wager", International Journal for Philosophy of Religion 44:115-19.
  • Hacking, Ian (1972) "The logic of Pascal’s wager", reprinted in Jordan 1994a.
  • James, William (1897) "The will to believe", reprinted in The Will to Believe and Other Essays, Dover.
  • Jordan, Jeff (1991) "The many-gods objection and Pascal’s wager", International Philosophical Quarterly 31:309-17.
  • Jordan, Jeff (1993) "Pascal’s wager and the problem of infinite utilities", Faith & Philosophy 10:49-59.
  • Jordan, Jeff, editor (1994a) Gambling on God, Lanham MD: Rowman & Littlefield.
  • Jordan, Jeff (1994b) "The many-gods objection", in Jordan 1994a; a restatement of Jordan 1991.
  • Lycan, William & George Schlesinger (1989) "You bet your life", in Reason & Responsibility, 7th edition (ed. Joel Feinberg, Belmont CA: Wadsworth). Also in the 8th, 9th, 10th editions; in Philosophy and the Human Condition, 2d edition (ed. Tom Beauchamp et al., Englewood Cliffs NJ: Prentice Hall, 1989); and in Contemporary Perspectives on Religious Epistemology (ed. Douglas Geivet & Brendan Sweetmar, Oxford, 1993). See also Schlesinger 1994.
  • Mackie, J.L. (1982) The Miracle of Theism, Oxford, pp. 200-03.
  • Martin, Michael (1975) "On four critiques of Pascal’s wager", Sophia 14:1-11.
  • Martin, Michael (1990) Atheism, Philadelphia: Temple University Press, pp. 229-38.
  • Mougin, Gregory & Elliott Sober (1994) "Betting on Pascal’s wager", Nous 28:382-95.
  • Nicholl, Larimore (1978) "Pascal’s Wager: The bet is off", Philosophy & Phenomenological Research 39:274-80.
  • Pascal, Blaise (composed in 1600s, first published in 1800s) Pensees, section 343; translated & reprinted by Penguin and many others.
  • Rescher, Nicholas (1985) Pascal’s Wager, University of Notre Dame Press.
  • Saka, Paul (2001) "Pascal’s wager and the many gods objection", Religious Studies 37:321-41.
  • Schlesinger, George (1994) "A central theistic argument", in Jordan 1994a; a restatement of Lycan & Schlesinger 1989.
  • Sorensen, Roy (1994) "Infinite decision theory", in Jordan 1994a.

See also: Faith and Reason

Author Information

Paul Saka
University of Texas, Pan American
U. S. A.

William Paley (1743—1805)

paleyEnglish theologian; born at Peterborough (37 miles northeast of Northampton) July, 1743; died at Lincoln May 25, 1805. His mother was a keen, thrifty woman of much intelligence, and his father was a minor canon at Peterborough and a pedagogue. In 1758 Paley entered, as sizar, Christ College, Cambridge. He had been a fair scholar at his father's school, especially interested in mathematics. After taking his degree in 1763, he became usher at an academy in Greenwich and, in 1766, was elected fellow of Christ College, where he became an intimate friend of John Law and lectured successfully on metaphysics, morals, and the Greek Testament. He offered lectures on Locke, Clark's Attributes, and Butler's Analogy; and in his lectures on divinity took the ground maintained in his Moral Philosophy that the Thirty- nine Articles were merely articles of peace, inasmuch as they contained about 240 distinct propositions, many of them inconsistent with each other. He had been ordained a priest in 1767, and was appointed to the rectory of Musgrave in Cumberland, which be resigned in 1776, to take the vicarage of the two parishes, Appleby and Dalston. In 1780, he was installed prebendary at Carlisle, and resigned Appleby on becoming archdeacon in 1782. At the close of 1785, he became chancellor of the diocese and (1789-92) figured as an active opponent of the slave-trade. Presented to the vicarage of Aldingham in 1792, he vacated Dalston for Stanwix in 1793. In recognition of his apologetic writings, he was given the prebend of St. Pancras in St. Paul's Cathedral; the subdeanery of Lincoln, in 1795; and the rectory of Bishop Warmouth in 1795; and transferred his residence to Lincoln shortly before his death.

Paley excelled as a writer of textbooks. He is an unrivaled expositor of plain arguments, but without much originality. His moral system, in which he is said to have anticipated Bentham, is the best statement of the utilitarianism of the eighteenth century. In theology and philosophy his common-sense method, which showed his limitations of intellect, by ignoring commonly perceived difficulties and by easily accepting conclusions, has been discarded. In the former he seems to have followed a liberal construction of orthodox views, sincerely convinced that his doctrines could be logically proved by rationalistic argument. His alleged plagiarism, even as to the classical illustration of the universe by a watch, must be understood in the light of his purpose in compiling text-books. Upon being urged by Law to expand his lectures he published The Moral and Political Philosophy (London, 1786). His most original work was Horce Paulince; or the Truth of the Scripture History of St. Paul evinced, by a Comparison of the Epistles which bear his name with the Acts of the Apostles and with one another (London, 1790; subsequent editions are by J. Tate, 1840; T. R. Birks, 1850; J. S. Howson, 1877; German ed. with annotations, H. P. C. Henke, Helmstadt, 1797). His prominent apologetic works are, A View of the Evidences of Christianity (London, 1794) and Natural History: or, Evidences of the Existence and Attributes of the Deity, Collected from the Appearances of Nature (1802): the first a compendium of the arguments against the eighteenth-century deists, and the second a clear account of the a posteriori argument from the facts of early Christianity. The Natural Theology, used for many years as a foremost text-book classic, has been superseded on account of the shifting of ground from the mechanical objective to the immanent subjective theory of the universe. Paley advances the teleological argument from design for the existence of God, an argument founded on the unity and adaptability of created things. This argument was based on rationalistic grounds; yet did not ultimately prove conclusive to rationalists themselves, and has not been able to survive criticism. His analogical method has run its course; the idea of a complex, perfected organism dropping suddenly amidst foreign surroundings, as illustrated by the finding of a watch, was the dogmatic externalism the rebound from which gave birth to the subsequent hypotheses of natural selection and adaptation to environment and the theory of evolution as a whole. In the Evidences, Paley proceeds along historical lines to affirm the truth of Christianity by two propositions; namely, that "there is clear proof that the apostles and their successors underwent the greatest hardships rather than give up the Gospel and cease to obey its precepts" and that "other miracles than those of the Gospel are not satisfactorily attested." To these he appends "auxiliary" arguments drawn from the "morality of the Gospel," "originality of Christ's character," and others. The argument is one- sided on account of its disregard of the field of Christian consciousness.

Paley also published Reasons for Contentment; addressed to the Laboring Part of the British Public (1793). Individual sermons which may be mentioned are: Dangers Incidental to the Clerical Character (1795); Assize Sermon at Durham (1795); as well as the compilations Sermons on Several Subjects and Sermons and Tracts (1808). The first collected edition of the works of William Paley appeared in 1805-08; one by A. Chalmers with biography (5 vols., London, 1819); one by E. Lynam (1825); and one by his son, E. Paley (1825).

Author Information

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These establishments were used for training youths in boxing and wrestling and were also frequented by Socrates and other philosophers. This article contains a discussion of the locations of the palaestrae (wrestling schools) that are known to have existed in Athens, and the the function of these establishments.

Table of Contents

  1. Locations
  2. Function
  3. References and Further Reading

1. Locations

Palaestrae were an integral part of larger gymnasia (areas for general physical training and athletics) and are attested for the three well-known gymnasia areas of Athens (the Academy [Hyperides,Demosthenes, fr. 6], Cynosarges [Diogenes Laertius, 6.30.8 and Aelian, True History 8.14.3], and Lyceum [Pseudo-Plutarch, Lives of the Orators 841d and 843f]). These schools for training in combat sports also existed separately from gymnasia in the city of Athens itself and in the countryside.

As a result of the difficulty of archaeological exploration amidst the urban sprawl of modern Athens, even the general locations of most of the palaestrae outside the major gymnasia areas of Archaic and Classical Athens and Attica are not known with certainty. Only two urban Athenian palaestrae may be roughly located: the palaistra of Taureas and the palaistra where Mikkos was a sophist. The palaistra of Taureas is said by Plato ( Charmides 153a, Lucian, Parasite 43) to have been opposite the sanctuary of Basile. Neither the sanctuary nor the palaistra may be located with any certainty, however, despite Travlos' confident statement that a boundary stone marking an unnamed sanctuary near the corner of modern Syngrou Blvd. and Hatzichristou St. refers to the sanctuary of Basile (Travlos, PDA 332 and fig. 435). The palaistra where Mikkos taught is said by Plato to have been near the Panops fountain, which has been placed in the neighborhood of the Diochares Gates in Northeast Athens (Ritchie, "Lyceum" 253-254 and Travlos, PDA 159-160).

There were palaestrae in the Attic countryside as well. For example, the sanctuary of Artemis at Brauron had both a gymnasium and a palaestra (SEG XL 91). Kephissia possessed a palaistra ( SEG XXXII 147) and it is likely that many of the other demes, especially large ones like Acharnae and Aphidna, had their own as well. There is also the case of the so-called "Palaestra of Cercyon," a palaestra belonging to a mythical person, but associated with an actual place along the Eleusis-Megara road (Bacchylides 18.26, Scholia of Arethas on Lucian 21.21). The travel writer Pausanias (1.39.3) himself visited the site.

Other palaestrae mentioned by the ancient sources include the place where Ariston of Argos trained Plato as a youth (Apuleius, On Plato 1.2 and Suda, s.v. Platon), the palaestra of Hippocrates (Pseudo-Plutarch, Lives of the Orators 837e) where Isocrates died in 337 BC, and the palaestra of Sibyrtios (Plutarch, Alcibiades 3) where a follower of Alcibiades was killed. For the other palaestrae mentioned by the ancient sources there is no indication of place or even number (Kratinos, fr. 176, Lysias, fr. 6.1Teisis, Theophrastus, Characters 7.5, Aelian Varia Historia 4.24.2, Pollux, Onomastica 2.13); some of these unnamed palaestrae may refer to the same structures or they may be independent facilities.

The palaestrae in the Academy, Brauron, Cynosarges, and Lyceum would have come under the superintendence of the cult officials who oversaw the larger gymnasia areas. Other palaestrae appear to have been overseen and regulated by public officials, such as the paidotribes or epistates (Aeschines,Against Timarchus 10). The only firm evidence for the private ownership of a palaestra comes from Theophrastus, who appears in this instance to be describing in extreme and unflattering terms a small, poorly constructed home palaestra (Theophrastus, Characters 21.15-16).

2. Function

The very name palaestra derives from the verb palaiein, meaning "to wrestle." Palaestrae had three basic functions: (1) as training areas for combat sports such as wrestling and boxing, (2) as areas for cult activity, and (3) as meeting places for discussion, philosophical and otherwise. Plato's depiction of Socrates engaging in philosophical discourse provides a most vivid picture of life in the Classical Athenian palaestrae. For example, in Plato's Lysis, it is a palaistra into which Socrates is drawn for a discussion of Eros (Sexual Love) and Philia (Friendship). Within the palaestra, boys play at games with knucklebones and engage in the more serious business of sacrificing to Hermes (Plato, Lysis 206c, Scholia of Arethas on Plato Lysis 206c, Proklos On Plato's Alcibiades 1.195.4). Older men sit on the edges of the enclosure discussing the physical and moral merits of the young men. In P lato's Charmides a similar scene is painted. In this dialogue Socrates returns from battle at Potidaea to the palaestra of Taureas, which is described as one of his regular haunts, and engages Critias and his young cousin Charmides in a discussion of sophrosyne or "temperance."

Plato's choice of the palaestra as a setting for two Socratic dialogues is no accident. Wrestling metaphors recur throughout the Platonic dialogues. For example, in the Phaedrus the conquest of the baser part of the soul by the virtuous part is compared with a wrestling victory in the Olympic games (256b, also compare Protagoras 350e). In part, this use of wrestling metaphors may be an autobiographical touch on the part of Plato, as later tradition tells us that he himself was successful as a young wrestler at the Nemean games (Suda, s.v. Platon). However, the placement of Socrates, a philosopher of the most active sort, amidst those training to fight is most apt. After all, Socrates always sought intellectual contests, not so much for the winning, he would say, but for gaining insight into the truth.

Both as a locale for philosophical discussion and teaching and as a metaphor for a struggle for the truth, palaestrae would continue to be used by philosophers throughout antiquity and become a common leitmotif in the writings of the Church Fathers of Late Antiquity and the Early Middle Ages.

3. References and Further Reading

  • W. Morison, "Attic Gymnasia and Palaistrai: Public or Private?" The Ancient World 31.2 (2000) 140-143.
  • W. Morison, "An Honorary Deme Decree and the Administration of a Palaistra in Kephissia," Zeitschrift für Papyrologie und Epigraphik 131 (2000) 93-98.
  • S. Glass, "The Greek Gymnasium: Some Problems," in The Archaeology of the Olympics, ed. W.J. Raschke. Madison 1988.
  • C.E. Ritchie, "The Lyceum, the Garden of Theophrastos and the Garden of the Muses. A Topographical Reevaluation," in Philia epê. Athens 1986-1989.
  • J. Travlos, Pictorial Dictionary of Ancient Athens. Athens 1971.
  • Wycherley, R.E. The Stones of Athens. Princeton 1978.

Author Information

William Morison
Grand Valley State University

John Locke: Political Philosophy

lockeJohn Locke (1632-1704) presents an intriguing figure in the history of political philosophy whose brilliance of exposition and breadth of scholarly activity remains profoundly influential.

Locke proposed a radical conception of political philosophy deduced from the principle of self-ownership and the corollary right to own property, which in turn is based on his famous claim that a man earns ownership over a resource when he mixes his labour with it. Government, he argued, should be limited to securing the life and property of its citizens, and is only necessary because in an ideal, anarchic state of nature, various problems arise that would make life more insecure than under the protection of a minimal state. Locke is also renown for his writings on toleration in which he espoused the right to freedom of conscience and religion (except when religion was deemed intolerant!), and for his cogent criticism of hereditary monarchy and patriarchalism. After his death, his mature political philosophy leant support to the British Whig party and its principles, to the Age of Enlightenment, and to the development of the separation of the State and Church in the American Constitution as well as to the rise of human rights theories in the Twentieth Century.

However, a closer study of any philosopher reveals aspects and depths that introductory caricatures (including this one) cannot portray, and while such articles seemingly present a completed sketch of all that can ever be known of a great thinker, it must always be remembered that a great thinker is rarely captured in a few pages or paragraphs by a lesser one, or one that approaches him with particular philosophical interest or bias: the reader, once contented with the glosses provided here, should always return to and scrutinise Locke in the original – just as an academic exposition of Beethoven’s Eroica symphony will always be a sallow reflection of the actual music.

This article summarises the general drift of Locke’s political thinking, leaving the other IEP article on Locke to examine his general philosophy and his theory of knowledge. The article touches on his biography as it relates to the development of his political thought, and it also provides an analysis of some of the issues that his philosophy raises – especially with regards to the Two Treatises of Government. Locke is rightly famous for his Treatises, yet during his life he repudiated his authorship, although he subtly recommended them as essential reading in letters and thoughts on reading for gentlemen. The Treatises swiftly became a classic in political philosophy, and its popularity has remained undiminished since his time: the ‘John Locke academic industry’ is vibrant and broad with an academic journal (John Locke Studies) and books regularly coming out dealing with his philosophy.

Table of Contents

  1. Reading Locke: An overview of his political philosophy.
  2. Political Life
    1. Oxford
    2. Shaftesbury
    3. Locke and Shaftesbury
  3. Locke’s Political Writings
    1. Oxford Writings (1652-1667)
    2. Two Tracts on Government
    3. Essays on the Law of Nature (1663-1664)
  4. Shaftesbury Era
    1. The Essay on Toleration (1667)
    2. Other Political Writings
    3. Economic Writings
  5. Two Treatises
    1. First Treatise
    2. Second Treatise
  6. Analysis of Locke’s Two Treatises
    1. State of Nature
    2. Reason and Violence
    3. Just War
    4. The Lockean State
    5. Property
  7. References and Further Reading
    1. Abbreviations Used
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Reading Locke: An overview of his political philosophy

The first caveat to note is that Locke’s political philosophy is divided into two discernible eras – his Oxford period (1652-66) and his Shaftesbury period, when he was employed by Lord Anthony Ashley-Cooper (later Earl of Shaftesbury) from 1666-1683 through his final years following Shaftesbury’s death. The ‘two Lockes’ are somewhat distinguishable and should certainly be born in mind, even if one were to concentrate solely on his Two Treatises, and ignore his earlier thinking. Nonetheless, the Treatises, written in his later incarnation should be read not just as classics in their own right but as the mature culmination of Locke’s political philosophy into an original and insightful theory of government, power, property, trust, and rights, for there are Lockean continuities in his political thinking that reach back into his earliest political sketches. For example, scriptural exegesis used to support his political ideas, and his fear of violence (national and towards him and his friends), uncertainty, war, and accordingly of any doctrine or behaviour that could lead to unsettling anarchy or persecution. It was a fear of persecution that kept him from admitting to authorship of the Two Treatises, after all Seventeenth Century Britain certainly produced many provocative and extreme opinions, and indeed a few writers, including some close associates, were executed for their seditious thoughts. Locke retained a fear for his life long after the troubles had died down.

The earlier Locke, a student and tutor at Oxford, was morally and politically conservative, Hobbesian one could say were such thoughts not so generally reflective of the post-bellum times in England in which strong and stable government was manifestly preferable to the apparent anarchy of the recent Civil Wars in the British Isles (1642-51). The mature Locke developed into a radical proponent of religious freedom, individual liberty and conscience. By no means did he become an anarchist or a thorough and consistent libertarian who decried the use of power – power, he believed, is essential to the running of a peaceful commonwealth, but it must be vigorously checked and controlled, as well as used to secure national interests. His later writings are certainly in the vein of what is now termed ‘classical liberalism’ upholding the sanctity of private property, self-ownership, minimal government, and the innate distrust of the use of power, yet throughout his political theorising and despite the later emphasis towards inviolable rights, he remains, politically conservative, economically mercantilist, morally authoritarian, highly Christian, and generally suspicious of swathes of people who could affect the Commonwealth’s peace and security (atheists, Quakers, Roman Catholics). Locke also enjoyed dabbling in rationalist designs for how societies ought to be run, which is far removed from the hero of libertarian thinking of live and let live that he is sometimes held to be.

For example, Locke retained an Oxford born academic scepticism of the people (tinted with a sense of noblesse oblige – he left money for the poor of the parishes of his birth and death) well into his Shaftesbury years, but this is later admixed with his political experiences in which he gained a healthier cynicism of those who wield power and of their effects on what he increasingly believed ought to remain private and thus beyond the remit of the magistrate. Throughout Locke’s writings those who would threaten or undermine government through their intolerance, leanings toward papal theocracy, or indulging in bone idleness are castigated and are to be outlawed according to his schemes: inconsistencies or at least intolerances or prudential considerations linger within his general libertarian framework. Indeed, writing in 1669 Locke accepts the institution of slavery (FCC) and as late as 1697 (a good decade and a half after writing the Two Treatises), he advises press-ganging beggars into military service and that begging minors should be “soundly whipped.” (EPL).

The second caveat is that Locke’s works deserve re-reading – only then, or even after several attempts, can one begin to enjoy the humour that sometimes punctuates the texts, and to see that Locke’s apparently circumlocutory style belies a great depth of thought peppered with qualifications and sub-clauses which are employed to tighten his argument. Locke neither rants from the extremes nor wraps his language in poetical mysticism to awe the superstitious, nor does he proffer snippets of profound metaphysical insights to satiate the quick reader. As a medical doctor and amateur scientist and the author of the classical work on epistemology and psychology, An Essay Concerning Human Understanding (1689, published the same year as the Two Treatise), it’s not surprising that Locke’s political writings are methodical and tightly argued. Locke’s arguments lifted from his texts present an uncompromising and modern vision of empiricism and scientific enquiry; however, his language is immersed in Old Testament anecdotes and references that when we peruse his writings, we must remember that John Locke was of Seventeenth Century Puritan and Scholastic background, and at Oxford he studied amidst the general University contract of religious uniformity until his departure on a freer, if relatively unsure foot, in employment with the politically ambitious courtier Lord Ashley.

The next section reviews Locke’s political biography and although it may be skipped for those interested in a cursory glance at the political arguments of the Two Treatises, it is of invaluable background for a more profound understanding.

2. Political Life

This section outlines the broad political events surrounding Locke’s life and thereby provides a useful, although not exhaustive, sketch of the man and the context of his works.

The Seventeenth Century was a period of immense upheavals – across Europe the Thirty Years Wars had raged (1608-48), and in Locke’s Britain, Civil War broke out in 1642: “I no sooner perceived myself in the world but I found myself in a storm.” (FT). He lived through the overthrow and execution of the monarch, the interregnum of the Cromwell’s Republic, the Restoration, and the overthrow of another monarch in the Glorious Revolution. Without some knowledge of this political context and thus the world in which he wrote and acted, it is difficult to understand the thrust of Locke’s political philosophy.

John Locke was born in 1632 in a cottage in the village of Wrington, near the great port of Bristol, Somerset, and was raised at Pensford a few miles to the west. The second Stuart King of England, Wales, Scotland, and Ireland had been on the throne for seven years – the ill-fated Charles I, whose reign was to lead to a brutal Civil War dividing the British along religious and political lines and which ended in his execution in 1649. Somerset was one of the most populous and rich counties of the country, yet despite its affluence gained from hard work and a division of labour, social strata (albeit highly flexible since Tudor times) permeated social relations – each individual had a moral superior to look up to in a moral hierarchy that ended with the monarch, whose superior was God. This political and social context is vital to be aware of, for the tensions and violence of the era permeate the atmosphere in which Locke matured and wrote his political writings.

The essential divisions that operated in the Civil Wars may be thought of as splitting Puritan or Independent religious proponents with supporters of the rights of Parliament (generally lumped into ‘Parliamentarians’) from adherents to the Anglican Church, closet Catholics, and supporters of the Royal Establishment (generally referred to as ‘Royalists’). Locke’s parents were low gentry Puritans (tanners and clothiers), and his father, an attorney to the local Justices of the Peace, went to war on the Parliamentarian side in the cavalry. The local city of Bristol was a Royalist stronghold during the wars but fell to the Parliamentarians in 1645, and in 1647, a good acquaintance of Locke’s father, officer and Member of Parliament for the West Country, Alexander Popham, secured young Master Locke a place at Westminster School in London in the first example of patronage that was to assist Locke’s career.

Locke’s family instilled him good values of independence and self-discipline, which he retained throughout his life, but the move to London opened up Locke’s mind and took him far from his parochial Puritan upbringing (Dunn). Westminster School was run by the formidable Dr Richard Busby, a Royalist, who was apparently fond of beating the boys, something the older Locke was to recommend for young beggars. Young Locke was there the same time as the poet and future apologist for Charles II, John Dryden (1644-54) and was at school at the time of Charles I’s execution on the scaffolding erected in front of the nearby Banqueting House (Jan. 1649). The execution caused a sympathetic reaction to the Royalist cause to foment during the next decade – and a posthumously published pamphlet, allegedly written by Charles (Eikon Basilike) encouraged the raising of his status from traitor (in the eyes of the High Court that tried him) to one of martyr, and it popularised not just the Stuart doctrine that the Stuarts (or monarchs in general) were divinely appointed (rather than chancing upon the throne of England – the last Tudor monarch, Elizabeth I died without issue), but that Parliamentarians were guilty of the heinous crime of regicide.

a. Oxford

In 1652 the twenty year old Locke moved onto Oxford’s Christ Church.

Oxford had enjoyed an influx of scientific inquiry and humanism – Roger Bacon (1220-92), John Wycliffe (1330-84), Desiderius Erasmus (1469-1536) and Sir Thomas More (1477-1535), all had their influence on the colleges. The present head of Christ Church for Locke was the Presbyterian John Owen (1616-83), a Puritan proponent of toleration and independence for Protestant sects and an earlier supporter and follower of Oliver Cromwell (1599-1658). (Owen travelled with Cromwell into his wars in Scotland and Ireland). Avoiding a career in theology and despising the dry Scholasticism (although the techniques and knowledge were of great use to his mind), Locke concentrated his studies on medical science at Oxford and later held teaching and diplomatic positions until meeting up with Lord Ashley Cooper in 1666 (later Earl of Shafte