Category Archives: History of Philosophy

Ludwig Wittgenstein (1889—1951)

Ludwig WittgensteinLudwig Wittgenstein is one of the most influential philosophers of the twentieth century, and regarded by some as the most important since Immanuel Kant. His early work was influenced by that of Arthur Schopenhauer and, especially, by his teacher Bertrand Russell and by Gottlob Frege, who became something of a friend. This work culminated in the Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus, the only philosophy book that Wittgenstein published during his lifetime. It claimed to solve all the major problems of philosophy and was held in especially high esteem by the anti-metaphysical logical positivists. The Tractatus is based on the idea that philosophical problems arise from misunderstandings of the logic of language, and it tries to show what this logic is. Wittgenstein's later work, principally his Philosophical Investigations, shares this concern with logic and language, but takes a different, less technical, approach to philosophical problems. This book helped to inspire so-called ordinary language philosophy. This style of doing philosophy has fallen somewhat out of favor, but Wittgenstein's work on rule-following and private language is still considered important, and his later philosophy is influential in a growing number of fields outside philosophy.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus
  3. Ethics and Religion
  4. Conception of Philosophy
  5. Meaning
  6. Rules and Private Language
  7. Realism and Anti-Realism
  8. Certainty
  9. Continuity
  10. Wittgenstein in History
  11. References and Further Reading
    1. Wittgenstein’s Main Works
    2. Some Biographies of Wittgenstein
    3. Secondary Works

1. Life

Ludwig Josef Johann Wittgenstein, born on April 26th 1889 in Vienna, Austria, was a charismatic enigma. He has been something of a cult figure but shunned publicity and even built an isolated hut in Norway to live in complete seclusion. His sexuality was ambiguous but he was probably gay; how actively so is still a matter of controversy. His life seems to have been dominated by an obsession with moral and philosophical perfection, summed up in the subtitle of Ray Monk's excellent biography Wittgenstein: The Duty of Genius.

His concern with moral perfection led Wittgenstein at one point to insist on confessing to several people various sins, including that of allowing others to underestimate the extent of his 'Jewishness'. His father Karl Wittgenstein's parents were born Jewish but converted to Protestantism and his mother Leopoldine (nee Kalmus) was Catholic, but her father was of Jewish descent. Wittgenstein himself was baptized in a Catholic church and was given a Catholic burial, although between baptism and burial he was neither a practicing nor a believing Catholic.

The Wittgenstein family was large and wealthy. Karl Wittgenstein was one of the most successful businessmen in the Austro-Hungarian Empire, leading the iron and steel industry there. The Wittgensteins' home attracted people of culture, especially musicians, including the composer Johannes Brahms, who was a friend of the family. Music remained important to Wittgenstein throughout his life. So did darker matters. Ludwig was the youngest of eight children, and of his four brothers, three committed suicide.

As for his career, Wittgenstein studied mechanical engineering in Berlin and in 1908 went to Manchester, England to do research in aeronautics, experimenting with kites. His interest in engineering led to an interest in mathematics which in turn got him thinking about philosophical questions about the foundations of mathematics. He visited the mathematician and philosopher Gottlob Frege (1848-1925), who recommended that he study with Bertrand Russell (1872-1970) in Cambridge. At Cambridge Wittgenstein greatly impressed Russell and G.E. Moore (1873- 1958), and began work on logic.

When his father died in 1913 Wittgenstein inherited a fortune, which he quickly gave away. When war broke out the next year, he volunteered for the Austrian army. He continued his philosophical work and won several medals for bravery during the war. The result of his thinking on logic was the Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus which was eventually published in English in 1922 with Russell's help. This was the only book Wittgenstein published during his lifetime. Having thus, in his opinion, solved all the problems of philosophy, Wittgenstein became an elementary school teacher in rural Austria, where his approach was strict and unpopular, but apparently effective. He spent 1926-28 meticulously designing and building an austere house in Vienna for his sister Gretl.

In 1929 he returned to Cambridge to teach at Trinity College, recognizing that in fact he had more work to do in philosophy. He became professor of philosophy at Cambridge in 1939. During World War II he worked as a hospital porter in London and as a research technician in Newcastle. After the war he returned to university teaching but resigned his professorship in 1947 to concentrate on writing. Much of this he did in Ireland, preferring isolated rural places for his work. By 1949 he had written all the material that was published after his death as Philosophical Investigations, arguably his most important work. He spent the last two years of his life in Vienna, Oxford and Cambridge and kept working until he died of prostate cancer in Cambridge in April 1951. His work from these last years has been published as On Certainty. His last words were, "Tell them I've had a wonderful life."

2. Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus

Wittgenstein told Ludwig von Ficker that the point of the Tractatus was ethical. In the preface to the book he says that its value consists in two things: "that thoughts are expressed in it" and "that it shows how little is achieved when these problems are solved." The problems he refers to are the problems of philosophy defined, we may suppose, by the work of Frege and Russell, and perhaps also Schopenhauer. At the end of the book Wittgenstein says "My propositions serve as elucidations in the following way: anyone who understands me eventually recognizes them as nonsensical" [emphasis added]. What to make of the Tractatus, its author, and the propositions it contains, then, is no easy matter.

The book certainly does not seem to be about ethics. It consists of numbered propositions in seven sets. Proposition 1.2 belongs to the first set and is a comment on proposition 1. Proposition 1.21 is about proposition 1.2, and so on. The seventh set contains only one proposition, the famous "What we cannot speak about we must pass over in silence."

Some important and representative propositions from the book are these:

1 The world is all that is the case.
4.01 A proposition is a picture of reality.
4.0312 ...My fundamental idea is that the 'logical constants' are not representatives; that there can be no representatives of the logic of facts.
4.121 ...Propositions show the logical form of reality. They display it.
4.1212 What can be shown, cannot be said.
4.5 ...The general form of a proposition is: This is how things stand.
5.43 ...all the propositions of logic say the same thing, to wit nothing.
5.4711 To give the essence of a proposition means to give the essence of all description, and thus the essence of the world.
5.6 The limits of my language mean the limits of my world.

Here and elsewhere in the Tractatus Wittgenstein seems to be saying that the essence of the world and of life is: This is how things are. One is tempted to add "--deal with it." That seems to fit what Cora Diamond has called his "accept and endure" ethics, but he says that the propositions of the Tractatus are meaningless, not profound insights, ethical or otherwise. What are we to make of this?

Many commentators ignore or dismiss what Wittgenstein said about his work and its aims, and instead look for regular philosophical theories in his work. The most famous of these in the Tractatus is the "picture theory" of meaning. According to this theory propositions are meaningful insofar as they picture states of affairs or matters of empirical fact. Anything normative, supernatural or (one might say) metaphysical must, it therefore seems, be nonsense. This has been an influential reading of parts of the Tractatus. Unfortunately, this reading leads to serious problems since by its own lights the Tractatus' use of words like "object," "reality" and "world" is illegitimate. These concepts are purely formal or a priori. A statement such as "There are objects in the world" does not picture a state of affairs. Rather it is, as it were, presupposed by the notion of a state of affairs. The "picture theory" therefore denies sense to just the kind of statements of which the Tractatus is composed, to the framework supporting the picture theory itself. In this way the Tractatus pulls the rug out from under its own feet.

If the propositions of the Tractatus are nonsensical then they surely cannot put forward the picture theory of meaning, or any other theory. Nonsense is nonsense. However, this is not to say that the Tractatus itself is without value. Wittgenstein's aim seems to have been to show up as nonsense the things that philosophers (himself included) are tempted to say. Philosophical theories, he suggests, are attempts to answer questions that are not really questions at all (they are nonsense), or to solve problems that are not really problems. He says in proposition 4.003 that:

Most of the propositions and questions of philosophers arise from our failure to understand the logic of our language. (They belong to the same class as the question whether the good is more or less identical than the beautiful.) And it is not surprising that the deepest problems are in fact not problems at all.

Philosophers, then, have the task of presenting the logic of our language clearly. This will not solve important problems but it will show that some things that we take to be important problems are really not problems at all. The gain is not wisdom but an absence of confusion. This is not a rejection of philosophy or logic. Wittgenstein took philosophical puzzlement very seriously indeed, but he thought that it needed dissolving by analysis rather than solving by the production of theories. The Tractatus presents itself as a key for untying a series of knots both profound and highly technical.

3. Ethics and Religion

Wittgenstein had a lifelong interest in religion and claimed to see every problem from a religious point of view, but never committed himself to any formal religion. His various remarks on ethics also suggest a particular point of view, and Wittgenstein often spoke of ethics and religion together. This point of view or attitude can be seen in the four main themes that run through Wittgenstein's writings on ethics and religion: goodness, value or meaning are not to be found in the world; living the right way involves acceptance of or agreement with the world, or life, or God's will, or fate; one who lives this way will see the world as a miracle; there is no answer to the problem of life--the solution is the disappearance of the problem.

Certainly Wittgenstein worried about being morally good or even perfect, and he had great respect for sincere religious conviction, but he also said, in his 1929 lecture on ethics, that "the tendency of all men who ever tried to write or talk Ethics or Religion was to run against the boundaries of language," i.e. to talk or write nonsense. This gives support to the view that Wittgenstein believed in mystical truths that somehow cannot be expressed meaningfully but that are of the utmost importance. It is hard to conceive, though, what these 'truths' might be.

An alternative view is that Wittgenstein believed that there is really nothing to say about ethics. This would explain why he wrote less and less about ethics as his life wore on. His "accept and endure" attitude and belief in going "the bloody hard way" are evident in all his work, especially after the Tractatus. Wittgenstein wants his reader not to think (too much) but to look at the "language games" (any practices that involve language) that give rise to philosophical (personal, existential, spiritual) problems. His approach to such problems is painstaking, thorough, open-eyed and receptive. His ethical attitude is an integral part of his method and shows itself as such.

But there is little to say about such an attitude short of recommending it. In Culture and Value p.29e Wittgenstein writes:

Rules of life are dressed up in pictures. And these pictures can only serve to describe what we are to do, not justify it. Because they could provide a justification only if they held good in other respects as well. I can say: "Thank these bees for their honey as though they were kind people who have prepared it for you"; that is intelligible and describes how I should like you to conduct yourself. But I cannot say: "Thank them because, look, how kind they are!"--since the next moment they may sting you.

In a world of contingency one cannot prove that a particular attitude is the correct one to take. If this suggests relativism, it should be remembered that it too is just one more attitude or point of view, and one without the rich tradition and accumulated wisdom, philosophical reasoning and personal experience of, say, orthodox Christianity or Judaism. Indeed crude relativism, the universal judgement that one cannot make universal judgements, is self- contradictory. Whether Wittgenstein's views suggest a more sophisticated form of relativism is another matter, but the spirit of relativism seems far from Wittgenstein's conservatism and absolute intolerance of his own moral shortcomings. Compare the tolerance that motivates relativism with Wittgenstein's assertion to Russell that he would prefer "by far" an organization dedicated to war and slavery to one dedicated to peace and freedom. (This assertion, however, should not be taken literally: Wittgenstein was no war-monger and even recommended letting oneself be massacred rather than taking part in hand-to-hand combat. It was apparently the complacency, and perhaps the self-righteousness, of Russell's liberal cause that Wittgenstein objected to.)

With regard to religion, Wittgenstein is often considered a kind of Anti-Realist (see below for more on this). He opposed interpretations of religion that emphasize doctrine or philosophical arguments intended to prove God's existence, but was greatly drawn to religious rituals and symbols, and considered becoming a priest. He likened the ritual of religion to a great gesture, as when one kisses a photograph. This is not based on the false belief that the person in the photograph will feel the kiss or return it, nor is it based on any other belief. Neither is the kiss just a substitute for a particular phrase, like "I love you." Like the kiss, religious activity does express an attitude, but it is not just the expression of an attitude in the sense that several other forms of expression might do just as well. There might be no substitute that would do. The same might be said of the whole language-game (or games) of religion, but this is a controversial point. If religious utterances, such as "God exists," are treated as gestures of a certain kind then this seems not to be treating them as literal statements. Many religious believers, including Wittgensteinian ones, would object strongly to this. There is room, though, for a good deal of sophisticated disagreement about what it means to take a statement literally. For instance, Charles Taylor's view, roughly, is that the real is whatever will not go away. If we cannot reduce talk about God to anything else, or replace it, or prove it false, then perhaps God is as real as anything else.

4. Conception of Philosophy

Wittgenstein's view of what philosophy is, or should be, changed little over his life. In the Tractatus he says at 4.111 that "philosophy is not one of the natural sciences," and at 4.112 "Philosophy aims at the logical clarification of thoughts." Philosophy is not descriptive but elucidatory. Its aim is to clear up muddle and confusion. It follows that philosophers should not concern themselves so much with what is actual, keeping up with the latest popularizations of science, say, which Wittgenstein despised. The philosopher's proper concern is with what is possible, or rather with what is conceivable. This depends on our concepts and the ways they fit together as seen in language. What is conceivable and what is not, what makes sense and what does not, depends on the rules of language, of grammar.

In Philosophical Investigations Sect. 90 Wittgenstein says:

Our investigation is a grammatical one. Such an investigation sheds light on our problem by clearing misunderstandings away. Misunderstandings concerning the use of words, caused, among other things, by certain analogies between the forms of expression in different regions of language.

The similarities between the sentences "I'll keep it in mind" and "I'll keep it in this box," for instance, (along with many others) can lead one to think of the mind as a thing something like a box with contents of its own. The nature of this box and its mental contents can then seem very mysterious. Wittgenstein suggests that one way, at least, to deal with such mysteries is to recall the different things one says about minds, memories, thoughts and so on, in a variety of contexts.

What one says, or what people in general say, can change. Ways of life and uses of language change, so meanings change, but not utterly and instantaneously. Things shift and evolve, but rarely if ever so drastically that we lose all grip on meaning. So there is no timeless essence of at least some and perhaps all concepts, but we still understand one another well enough most of the time.

When nonsense is spoken or written, or when something just seems fishy, we can sniff it out. The road out of confusion can be a long and difficult one, hence the need for constant attention to detail and particular examples rather than generalizations, which tend to be vague and therefore potentially misleading. The slower the route, the surer the safety at the end of it. That is why Wittgenstein said that in philosophy the winner is the one who finishes last. But we cannot escape language or the confusions to which it gives rise, except by dying. In the meantime, Wittgenstein offers four main methods to avoid philosophical confusion, as described by Norman Malcolm: describing circumstances in which a seemingly problematic expression might actually be used in everyday life, comparing our use of words with imaginary language games, imagining fictitious natural history, and explaining psychologically the temptation to use a certain expression inappropriately.

The complex, intertwined relationship between a language and the form of life that goes with it means that problems arising from language cannot just be set aside--they infect our lives, making us live in confusion. We might find our way back to the right path, but there is no guarantee that we will never again stray. In this sense there can be no progress in philosophy.

In 1931 Wittgenstein described his task thus:

Language sets everyone the same traps; it is an immense network of easily accessible wrong turnings. And so we watch one man after another walking down the same paths and we know in advance where he will branch off, where walk straight on without noticing the side turning, etc. etc. What I have to do then is erect signposts at all the junctions where there are wrong turnings so as to help people past the danger points.

But such signposts are all that philosophy can offer and there is no certainty that they will be noticed or followed correctly. And we should remember that a signpost belongs in the context of a particular problem area. It might be no help at all elsewhere, and should not be treated as dogma. So philosophy offers no truths, no theories, nothing exciting, but mainly reminders of what we all know. This is not a glamorous role, but it is difficult and important. It requires an almost infinite capacity for taking pains (which is one definition of genius) and could have enormous implications for anyone who is drawn to philosophical contemplation or who is misled by bad philosophical theories. This applies not only to professional philosophers but to any people who stray into philosophical confusion, perhaps not even realizing that their problems are philosophical and not, say, scientific.

5. Meaning

Sect. 43 of Wittgenstein's Philosophical Investigations says that: "For a large class of cases--though not for all--in which we employ the word "meaning" it can be defined thus: the meaning of a word is its use in the language."

It is quite clear that here Wittgenstein is not offering the general theory that "meaning is use," as he is sometimes interpreted as doing. The main rival views that Wittgenstein warns against are that the meaning of a word is some object that it names--in which case the meaning of a word could be destroyed, stolen or locked away, which is nonsense--and that the meaning of a word is some psychological feeling--in which case each user of a word could mean something different by it, having a different feeling, and communication would be difficult if not impossible.

Knowing the meaning of a word can involve knowing many things: to what objects the word refers (if any), whether it is slang or not, what part of speech it is, whether it carries overtones, and if so what kind they are, and so on. To know all this, or to know enough to get by, is to know the use. And generally knowing the use means knowing the meaning. Philosophical questions about consciousness, for example, then, should be responded to by looking at the various uses we make of the word "consciousness." Scientific investigations into the brain are not directly relevant to this inquiry (although they might be indirectly relevant if scientific discoveries led us to change our use of such words). The meaning of any word is a matter of what we do with our language, not something hidden inside anyone's mind or brain. This is not an attack on neuroscience. It is merely distinguishing philosophy (which is properly concerned with linguistic or conceptual analysis) from science (which is concerned with discovering facts).

One exception to the meaning-is-use rule of thumb is given in Philosophical Investigations Sect.561, where Wittgenstein says that "the word "is" is used with two different meanings (as the copula and as the sign of equality)" but that its meaning is not its use. That is to say, "is" has not one complex use (including both "Water is clear" and "Water is H2O") and therefore one complex meaning, but two quite distinct uses and meanings. It is an accident that the same word has these two uses. It is not an accident that we use the word "car" to refer to both Fords and Hondas. But what is accidental and what is essential to a concept depends on us, on how we use it.

This is not completely arbitrary, however. Depending on one's environment, one's physical needs and desires, one's emotions, one's sensory capacities, and so on, different concepts will be more natural or useful to one. This is why "forms of life" are so important to Wittgenstein. What matters to you depends on how you live (and vice versa), and this shapes your experience. So if a lion could speak, Wittgenstein says, we would not be able to understand it. We might realize that "roar" meant zebra, or that "roar, roar" meant lame zebra, but we would not understand lion ethics, politics, aesthetic taste, religion, humor and such like, if lions have these things. We could not honestly say "I know what you mean" to a lion. Understanding another involves empathy, which requires the kind of similarity that we just do not have with lions, and that many people do not have with other human beings.

When a person says something what he or she means depends not only on what is said but also on the context in which it is said. Importance, point, meaning are given by the surroundings. Words, gestures, expressions come alive, as it were, only within a language game, a culture, a form of life. If a picture, say, means something then it means so to somebody. Its meaning is not an objective property of the picture in the way that its size and shape are. The same goes of any mental picture. Hence Wittgenstein's remark that "If God had looked into our minds he would not have been able to see there whom we were speaking of." Any internal image would need interpretation. If I interpret my thought as one of Hitler and God sees it as Charlie Chaplin, who is right? Which of the two famous contemporaries of Wittgenstein's I mean shows itself in the way I behave, the things I do and say. It is in this that the use, the meaning, of my thought or mental picture lies. "The arrow points only in the application that a living being makes of it."

6. Rules and Private Language

Without sharing certain attitudes towards the things around us, without sharing a sense of relevance and responding in similar ways, communication would be impossible. It is important, for instance, that nearly all of us agree nearly all the time on what colors things are. Such agreement is part of our concept of color, Wittgenstein suggests. Regularity of the use of such concepts and agreement in their application is part of language, not a logically necessary precondition of it. We cannot separate the life in which there is such agreement from our concept of color. Imagine a different form or way of life and you imagine a different language with different concepts, different rules and a different logic.

This raises the question of the relation between language and forms or ways of life. For instance, could just one person have a language of his or her own? To imagine an individual solitary from birth is scarcely to imagine a form of life at all, but more like just imagining a life- form. Moreover, language involves rules establishing certain linguistic practices. Rules of grammar express the fact that it is our practice to say this (e.g. "half past twelve") and not that (e.g. "half to one"). Agreement is essential to such practices. Could a solitary individual, then, engage in any practice, including linguistic ones? With whom could he or she agree? This is a controversial issue in the interpretation of Wittgenstein. Gordon Baker and P.M.S. Hacker hold that such a solitary man could speak his own language, follow his own rules, and so on, agreeing, over time, with himself in his judgements and behavior. Orthodoxy is against this interpretation, however.

Norman Malcolm has written that "If you conceive of an individual who has been in solitude his whole life long, then you have cut away the background of instruction, correction, acceptance--in short, the circumstances in which a rule is given, enforced, and followed." Mere regularity of behavior does not constitute following rules, whether they be rules of grammar or any other kind. A car that never starts in cold weather does not follow the rule "Don't start when it's cold," nor does a songbird follow a rule in singing the same song every day. Whether a solitary-from-birth individual would ever do anything that we would properly call following a rule is at least highly doubtful. How could he or she give himself or herself a rule to follow without language? And how could he or she get a language? Inventing one would involve inventing meaning, as Rush Rhees has argued, and this sounds incoherent. (The most famous debate about this was between Rhees and A.J. Ayer. Unfortunately for Wittgenstein, Ayer is generally considered to have won.) Alternatively, perhaps the Crusoe-like figure just does behave, sound, etc. just like a native speaker of, say, English. But this is to imagine either a freakish automaton, not a human being, or else a miracle. In the case of a miracle, Wittgenstein says, it is significant that we imagine not just the pseudo- Crusoe but also God. In the case of the automatic speaker, we might adopt what Daniel Dennett calls an "intentional stance" towards him, calling what he does "speaking English," but he is obviously not doing what the rest of us English-speakers--who learned the language, rather than being born speaking it, and who influence and are influenced by others in our use of the language--do.

The debate about solitary individuals is sometimes referred to as the debate about "private language." Wittgenstein uses this expression in another context, however, to name a language that refers to private sensations. Such a private language by definition cannot be understood by anyone other than its user (who alone knows the sensations to which it refers). Wittgenstein invites us to imagine a man who decides to write 'S' in his diary whenever he has a certain sensation. This sensation has no natural expression, and 'S' cannot be defined in words. The only judge of whether 'S' is used correctly is the inventor of 'S'. The only criterion of correctness is whether a sensation feels the same to him or her. There are no criteria for its being the same other than its seeming the same. So he writes 'S' when he feels like it. He might as well be doodling. The so-called 'private language' is no language at all. The point of this is not to show that a private language is impossible but to show that certain things one might want to say about language are ultimately incoherent. If we really try to picture a world of private objects (sensations) and inner acts of meaning and so on, we see that what we picture is either regular public language or incomprehensible behavior (the man might as well quack as say or write 'S').

This does not, as has been alleged, make Wittgenstein a behaviorist. He does not deny the existence of sensations or experiences. Pains, tickles, itches, etc. are all part of human life, of course. At Philosophical Investigations Sect. 293 Wittgenstein says that "if we construe the grammar of the expression of sensation on the model of 'object and designation' the object drops out of consideration as irrelevant." This suggests not that pains and so on are irrelevant but that we should not construe the grammar of the expression of sensation on the model of 'object and designation'. If we want to understand a concept like pain we should not think of a pain as a private object referred to somehow by the public word "pain." A pain is not "a something," just as love, democracy and strength are not things, but it is no more "a nothing" than they are either (see Philosophical Investigations Sect. 304). Saying this is hardly satisfactory, but there is no simple answer to the question "What is pain?" Wittgenstein offers not an answer but a kind of philosophical 'therapy' intended to clear away what can seem so obscure. To judge the value of this therapy, the reader will just have to read Wittgenstein's work for herself.

The best known work on Wittgenstein's writings on this whole topic is Saul A. Kripke's Wittgenstein on Rules and Private Language. Kripke is struck by the idea that anything might count as continuing a series or following a rule in the same way. It all depends on how the rule or series is interpreted. And any rule for interpretation will itself be subject to a variety of interpretations, and so on. What counts as following a rule correctly, then, is not determined somehow by the rule itself but by what the relevant linguistic community accepts as following the rule. So whether two plus two equals four depends not on some abstract, extra-human rule of addition, but on what we, and especially the people we appoint as experts, accept. Truth conditions are replaced by assertability conditions. To put it crudely, what counts is not what is true or right (in some sense independent of the community of language users), but what you can get away with or get others to accept.

Kripke's theory is clear and ingenious, and owes a lot to Wittgenstein, but is doubtful as an interpretation of Wittgenstein. Kripke himself presents the argument not as Wittgenstein's, nor as his own, but as "Wittgenstein's argument as it struck Kripke" (Kripke p.5). That the argument is not Wittgenstein's is suggested by the fact that it is a theory, and Wittgenstein rejected philosophical theories, and by the fact that the argument relies heavily on the first sentence of Philosophical Investigations Sect. 201: "This was our paradox: no course of action could be determined by a rule, because every course of action can be made out to accord with the rule." For Kripke's theory as a reading of Wittgenstein, it is not good that the very next paragraph begins, "It can be seen that there is a misunderstanding here..." Still, it is no easy matter to see just where Wittgenstein does diverge from the hybrid person often referred to as 'Kripkenstein'. The key perhaps lies later in the same paragraph, where Wittgenstein writes that "there is a way of grasping a rule which is not an interpretation". Many scholars, notably Baker and Hacker, have gone to great lengths to explain why Kripke is mistaken. Since Kripke is so much easier to understand, one of the best ways into Wittgenstein's philosophy is to study Kripke and his Wittgensteinian critics. At the very least, Kripke introduces his readers well to issues that were of great concern to Wittgenstein and shows their importance.

7. Realism and Anti-Realism

Wittgenstein's place in the debate about philosophical Realism and Anti-Realism is an interesting one. His emphasis on language and human behavior, practices, etc. makes him a prime candidate for Anti-Realism in many people's eyes. He has even been accused of linguistic idealism, the idea that language is the ultimate reality. The laws of physics, say, would by this theory just be laws of language, the rules of the language game of physics. Anti-Realist scepticism of this kind has proved quite popular in the philosophy of science and in theology, as well as more generally in metaphysics and ethics.

On the other hand, there is a school of Wittgensteinian Realism, which is less well known. Wittgenstein's views on religion, for instance, are often compared with those of Simone Weil, who was a Platonist of sorts. Sabina Lovibond argues for a kind of Wittgensteinian Realism in ethics in her Realism and Imagination in Ethics and the influence of Wittgenstein is clear in Raimond Gaita's Good and Evil: An Absolute Conception. However, one should not go too far with the idea of Wittgensteinian Realism. Lovibond, for instance, equates objectivity with intersubjectivity (universal agreement), so her Realism is of a controversial kind.

Both Realism and Anti-Realism, though, are theories, or schools of theories, and Wittgenstein explicitly rejects the advocacy of theories in philosophy. This does not prove that he practiced what he preached, but it should give us pause. It is also worth noting that supporters of Wittgenstein often claim that he was neither a Realist nor an Anti-Realist, at least with regard to metaphysics. There is something straightforwardly unWittgensteinian about the Realist's belief that language/thought can be compared with reality and found to 'agree' with it. The Anti-Realist says that we could not get outside our thought or language (or form of life or language games) to compare the two. But Wittgenstein was concerned not with what we can or cannot do, but with what makes sense. If metaphysical Realism is incoherent then so is its opposite. The nonsensical utterance "laubgefraub" is not to be contradicted by saying, "No, it is not the case that laubgefraub," or "Laubgefraub is a logical impossibility." If Realism is truly incoherent, as Wittgenstein would say, then so is Anti-Realism.

8. Certainty

Wittgenstein's last writings were on the subject of certainty. He wrote in response to G.E. Moore's attack on scepticism about the external world. Moore had held up one hand, said "Here is one hand," then held up his other hand and said "and here is another." His point was that things outside the mind really do exist, we know they do, and that no grounds for scepticism could be strong enough to undermine this commonsense knowledge.

Wittgenstein did not defend scepticism, but questioned Moore's claim to know that he had two hands. Such 'knowledge' is not something that one is ever taught, or finds out, or proves. It is more like a background against which we come to know other things. Wittgenstein compares this background to the bed of a river. This river bed provides the support, the context, in which claims to know various things have meaning. The bed itself is not something we can know or doubt. In normal circumstances no sane person doubts how many hands he or she has. But unusual circumstances can occur and what was part of the river bed can shift and become part of the river. I might, for instance, wake up dazed after a terrible accident and wonder whether my hands, which I cannot feel, are still there or not. This is quite different, though, from Descartes's pretended doubt as to whether he has a body at all. Such radical doubt is really not doubt at all, from Wittgenstein's point of view. And so it cannot be dispelled by a proof that the body exists, as Moore tried to do.

9. Continuity

Wittgenstein is generally considered to have changed his thinking considerably over his philosophical career. His early work culminated in the Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus with its picture theory of language and mysticism, according to this view. Then there came a transitional middle period when he first returned to philosophical work after realizing that he had not solved all the problems of philosophy. This period led to his mature, later period which gave us the Philosophical Investigations and On Certainty.

There certainly are marked changes in Wittgenstein's work, but the differences between his early and late work can be exaggerated. Two central discontinuities in his work are these: whereas the Tractatus is concerned with the general form of the proposition, the general nature of metaphysics, and so on, in his later work Wittgenstein is very critical of "the craving for generality"; and, in the Tractatus Wittgenstein speaks of the central problems of philosophy, whereas the later work treats no problems as central. Another obvious difference is in Wittgenstein's style. The Tractatus is a carefully constructed set of short propositions. The Investigations, though also consisting of numbered sections, is longer, less clearly organized and more rambling, at least in appearance. This reflects Wittgenstein's rejection of the idea that there are just a few central problems in philosophy, and his insistence on paying attention to particular cases, going over the rough ground.

On the other hand, the Tractatus itself says that its propositions are nonsense and thus, in a sense (not easy to understand), rejects itself. The fact that the later work also criticizes the Tractatus is not, therefore, proof of discontinuity in Wittgenstein's work. The main change may have been one of method and style. Problems are investigated one at a time, although many overlap. There is not a full-frontal assault on the problem or problems of philosophy. Otherwise, the Tractatus and the Philosophical Investigations attack much the same problems; they just do so in different ways.

10. Wittgenstein in History

Wittgenstein's place in the history of philosophy is a peculiar one. His philosophical education was unconventional (going from engineering to working first-hand with one of the greatest philosophers of his day in Bertrand Russell) and he seems never to have felt the need to go back and make a thorough study of the history of philosophy. He was interested in Plato, admired Leibniz, but was most influenced by the work of Schopenhauer, Russell and Frege.

From Schopenhauer (perhaps) Wittgenstein got his interest in solipsism and in the ethical nature of the relation between the will and the world. Schopenhauer's saying that "The world is my idea," (from The World as Will and Idea) is echoed in such remarks as "The world is my world" (from Tractatus 5.62). What Wittgenstein means here, where he also says that what the solipsist means is quite correct, but that it cannot be said, is obscure and controversial. Some have taken him to mean that solipsism is true but for some reason cannot be expressed. H.O. Mounce, in his valuable Wittgenstein's Tractatus: An Introduction, says that this interpretation is surely wrong. Mounce's view is that Wittgenstein holds solipsism itself to be a confusion, but one that sometimes arises when one tries to express the fact that "I have a point of view on the world which is without neighbours." (Mounce p.91) Wittgenstein was not a solipsist but he remained interested in solipsism and related problems of scepticism throughout his life.

Frege was a mathematician as well as a logician. He was interested in questions of truth and falsehood, sense and reference (a distinction he made famous) and in the relation between objects and concepts, propositions and thoughts. But his interest was in logic and mathematics exclusively, not in psychology or ethics. His great contribution to logic was to introduce various mathematical elements into formal logic, including quantification, functions, arguments (in the mathematical sense of something substituted for a variable in a function) and the value of a function. In logic this value, according to Frege, is always either the True or the False, hence the notion of truth-value. Both Frege and Russell wanted to show that mathematics is an extension of logic. Undoubtedly both men influenced Wittgenstein enormously, especially since he worked first-hand with Russell. Some measure of their importance to him can be seen in the preface to the Tractatus, where Wittgenstein says that he is "indebted to Frege's great works and to the writings of my friend Mr Bertrand Russell for much of the stimulation of my thoughts." For some insight into whether Frege or Russell had the greater influence one can consider whether one would rather be recognized for his or her great works or for simply being a friend.

In turn Wittgenstein influenced twentieth century philosophy enormously. The Vienna Circle logical positivists were greatly impressed by what they found in the Tractatus, especially the idea that logic and mathematics are analytic, the verifiability principle and the idea that philosophy is an activity aimed at clarification, not the discovery of facts. Wittgenstein, though, said that it was what is not in the Tractatus that matters most.

The other group of philosophers most obviously indebted to Wittgenstein is the ordinary language or Oxford school of thought. These thinkers were more interested in Wittgenstein's later work and its attention to grammar.

Wittgenstein is thus a doubly key figure in the development and history of analytic philosophy, but he has become rather unfashionable because of his anti-theoretical, anti-scientism stance, because of the difficulty of his work, and perhaps also because he has been little understood. Similarities between Wittgenstein's work and that of Derrida are now generating interest among continental philosophers, and Wittgenstein may yet prove to be a driving force behind the emerging post-analytic school of philosophy.

11. References and Further Reading

A full bibliographical guide to works by and on Wittgenstein would fill a whole book, namely Wittgenstein: A Bibliographical Guide by Guido Frongia and Brian McGuinness (Basil Blackwell, Oxford 1990). Obviously this is already out of date. Instead of a complete guide, therefore, what follows is a list of some of Wittgenstein's main works, some of the best secondary material on his work, and a few other works chosen for their accessibility and entertainment value, for want of a better expression.

a. Wittgenstein's Main Works

  • Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus, translated by D.F. Pears and B.F. McGuinness (Routledge and Kegan Paul, London 1961).
    • His early classic.
  • The Blue and Brown Books, (Basil Blackwell, Oxford 1969).
    • From his middle period, these are preliminary studies for his later work.
  • Philosophical Investigations, translated by G.E.M. Anscombe (Basil Blackwell, Oxford 1963).
    • His late classic.
  • On Certainty, edited by G.E.M. Anscombe and G.H. von Wright, translated by Denis Paul and G.E.M. Anscombe (Basil Blackwell, Oxford 1979).
    • Like many of Wittgenstein's works, this was compiled after his death from notes he had made. In this case the notes come from the last year and a half of his life.Works of more general interest by Wittgenstein include these:
  • Culture and Value, translated by Peter Winch (Basil Blackwell, Oxford 1980).
    • These are notes from throughout Wittgenstein's life dealing with all kinds of topics hinted at by its title, including music, literature, philosophy, religion and the value of silliness.
  • Lectures and Conversations on Aesthetics, Psychology and Religious Belief, edited by Cyril Barrett (Basil Blackwell, Oxford 1966).
    • For 'psychology' read 'Freud', otherwise the title is explanation enough. Hilary Putnam has recommended the section on religion as a valuable introduction to Wittgenstein's philosophy as a whole.

b. Some Biographies of Wittgenstein

  • Ray Monk Ludwig Wittgenstein: The Duty of Genius (Jonathan Cape, London 1990).
    • Full of enlightening detail.
  • Norman Malcolm Ludwig Wittgenstein: A Memoir (Oxford University Press, Oxford and New York 1984).
    • Shorter and includes material from G.H. von Wright as well. Two of the best books on the Tractatus are:
  • G.E.M. Anscombe An Introduction to Wittgenstein's Tractatus (University of Pennsylvania Press, Philadelphia 1971).
    • Emphasizes the importance of Frege and is notoriously difficult
  • H.O. Mounce Wittgenstein's Tractatus: An Introduction (Basil Blackwell, Oxford 1981).
    • Lighter but more reader-friendly.

c. Secondary Works

A good rule of thumb for picking secondary material on Wittgenstein is to trust Wittgenstein's own judgement. He chose G.E.M. Anscombe, Rush Rhees and G.H. von Wright to understand and deal with his unpublished writings after his death. Anything by one of these people should be fairly reliable. More contentiously, I would say that the best people writing on Wittgenstein today are James Conant and Cora Diamond. Other books referred to in the text above or of special note are these:

  • O.K. Bouwsma Wittgenstein: Conversations 1949-1951, edited by J.L. Craft and Ronald E. Hustwit (Hackett, Indianapolis 1986).
    • A seemingly little read slim volume that includes records of Wittgenstein's comments on such diverse and interesting topics as Descartes, utilitarianism and the word 'cheeseburger'.
  • Stanley Cavell The Claim of Reason: Wittgenstein, Skepticism, Morality, and Tragedy (Oxford University Press, Oxford and New York 1979).
    • A long, rich, challenging classic.
  • Cora Diamond The Realistic Spirit: Wittgenstein, Philosophy, and the Mind (MIT, Cambridge, Massachusetts 1991).
    • A collection of essays of varying degrees of accessibility on Frege, Wittgenstein and ethics, united by their Wittgensteinian spirit.
  • M.O'C. Drury The Danger of Words (Thoemmes Press, Bristol, U.K. and Washington, D.C. 1996).
    • A classic, including discussions of issues in psychiatry and religion by a friend of Wittgenstein's.
  • Paul Engelmann Letters from Wittgenstein with a memoir (Basil Blackwell, Oxford 1967).
    • Includes discussions by Wittgenstein and his friend Engelmann on the Tractatus, religion, literature and culture.
  • Saul A. Kripke Wittgenstein on Rules and Private Language (Harvard University Press, Cambridge, Massachusetts 1982).
    • See the section on rules and private language above.
  • Norman Malcolm Wittgenstein: Nothing is Hidden (Basil Blackwell, Oxford 1986).
    • One of the best accounts of Wittgenstein's philosophy from the disreputable point of view that the Tractatus advanced theses which are then attacked in the later work.
  • Norman Malcolm Wittgenstein: A Religious Point of View?, edited with a response by Peter Winch (Cornell University Press, Ithaca, New York 1994).
    • Malcolm basically summarizes Wittgenstein's philosophy, as he understands it, with a special emphasis on religion. Winch then responds, correcting Malcolm's account where necessary. The result is a highly accessible composite overview of Wittgenstein's work from the religious point of view, which is how Wittgenstein himself said that he saw every problem.

Author Information

Duncan J. Richter
Email: RICHTERDJ@vmi.edu
Virginia Military Institute
U. S. A.

Vienna Circle

The Vienna Circle is a group of philosophers who gathered round Moritz Schlick, after his coming in Vienna in 1922. They organized a philosophical association, named Verein Ernst Mach (Ernst Mach Association). However, meetings on philosophy of science and epistemology began as early as 1907, promoted by Frank, Hahn and Neurath, who later arranged to bring Schlick at the University of Vienna. Among Vienna Circle's members were M. Schlick, Rudolf Carnap, H. Feigl, P. Frank, K. Gödel, H. Hahn, V. Kraft, O. Neurath, F. Waismann. Also K. R. Popper and H. Kelsen had many contacts with the Vienna Circle, although they did not belong to it. At the meetings, the Tractatus of Ludwig Wittgenstein was also discussed, and there were several meetings between Wittgenstein, Schlick, Waismann and Carnap. In 1929 Hahn, Neurath and Carnap published the manifesto of the circle: Wissenschaftliche Weltauffassung. Der Wiener Kreis (A scientific world-view. The Vienna Circle).

Vienna Circle was very active in advertising the new philosophical ideas of logical positivism. Several congresses on epistemology and philosophy of science were organized, with the help of the Berlin Circle. There were some preparatory congresses: Prague (1929), Könisberg (1930), Prague (1934) and then the first congress on scientific philosophy held in Paris (1935), followed by congresses in Copenhagen (1936), Paris (1937), Cambridge, England (1938), Cambridge, Mass. (1939). The Könisberg congress (1930) was very important, because Gödel announced he had proved the completeness of first order logic and the incompleteness of arithmetic. Another very interesting congress was the one held in Copenhagen (1936), which was dedicated to quantum physics and causality.

Between 1928 and 1937, the Vienna Circle published ten books in a series named Schriften zur wissenschaftlichen Weltauffassung (Papers on the Scientific Worldview), edited by Schlick and Frank. Among these works was Logik der Forschung, 1935, which is the first book published by K. R. Popper. Seven works were published in another series, called Einheitswissenschaft (Unified Science), edit by Carnap, Frank, Hahn, Neurath, Joergensen (after Hahn's death) and Morris (from 1938). In 1930 Carnap and Hans Reichenbach undertook the editorship of the journal Erkenntnis, which was published between 1930 and 1940 (from 1939 the editors were Neurath, Carnap and Morris).

The following is the list of works published in the two series edited by the Vienna Circle.

(1) Schriften zur wissenschaftlichen Weltauffassung (Papers on scientific world-view), edit by Schlick and Frank.

  • R. von Mises, Wahrscheinlichkeit, Statistik und Wahrheit, 1928 (Probability, statistics, and truth, New York : Macmillan company, 1939)
  • R. Carnap, Abriss der Logistik, 1929
  • M. Schlick, Fragen der Ethik, 1930 (Problems of ethics, New York : Prentice-Hall, 1939)
  • O. Neurath, Empirische Soziologie, 1931
  • P. Frank, Das Kausalgesetz und seine Grenzen, 1932 (The law of causality and its limits, Dordrecth ; Boston : Kluwer, 1997)
  • O. Kant, Zur Biologie der Ethik, 1932
  • R. Carnap, Logische Syntax der Sprache, 1934 (The logical syntax of language, New York : Humanities, 1937)
  • K. R. Popper, Logik der Forschung, 1934 (The logic of scientific discovery, New York : Basic Books, 1959)
  • J. Sch&aumlcheter, Prologomena zu einer kritischen Grammatik, 1935 (Prolegomena to a critical grammar, Dordrecth ; Boston : D. Reidel Pub. Co., 1973)
  • V. Kraft, Die Grundlagen einer wissenschaftliche Wertlehre, 1937 (Foundations for a scientific analysis of value, Dordrecth ; Boston : D. Reidel Pub. Co., 1981)

(2) Einheitswissenschaft (Unified science), edit by Carnap, Frank, Hahn, Neurath, Joergensen (after Hahn's death), Morris (from 1938)

  • H. Hahn, Logik, Mathematik und Naturerkennen, 1933
  • O. Neurath, Einheitswissenschaft und Psychologie, 1933
  • R. Carnap, Die Aufgabe der Wissenschaftlogik, 1934
  • P. Frank, Das Ende der mechanistichen Physik, 1935
  • O. Neurath, Was bedeutet rationale Wirtschaftsbetrachtung, 1935
  • O. Neurath, E. Brunswik, C. Hull, G. Mannoury, J. Woodger, Zur Enzyclop&aumldie der Einheitswissenschaft. Vortr&aumlge, 1938
  • R. von Mises, Ernst Mach und die empiritische Wissenschaftauffasung, 1939

These works are translated in Unified science - The Vienna Circle monograph series originally edited by Otto Neurath, Kluwer, 1987.

The members of the Vienna Circle were dispersed when Nazi party went into power in Germany; many of them emigrated to USA, where they taught in several universities. Schlick remained in Austria, but in 1936 he was killed by a Nazi sympathizer student in the University of Vienna.

See also Carnap, Logical positivism.

Author Information

Mauro Murzi
Italy

Voluntarism

Voluntarism is the theory that God or the ultimate nature of reality is to be conceived as some form of will (or conation). This theory is contrasted to intellectualism, which gives primacy to God's reason. The voluntarism/intellectualism distinction was intimately tied to medieval and modern theories of natural law; if we grant that moral or physical laws issue from God, it next needs to be answered whether they issue from God's will or God's reason. In medieval philosophy, voluntarism was championed by Avicebron, Duns Scotus, and William of Ockham. Intellectualism, on the other hand, is found in Averroes, Aquinas, and Eckhart. The opposing theories were applied to the human psychology, the nature of God, ethics, and the heaven. According to intellectualism, choices of the will result from that which the intellect recognizes as good; the will itself is determined. For voluntarism, by contrast, it is the will which determines which objects are good, and the will itself is indetermined. Concerning the nature of heaven, intellectualists followed Aristotle's lead by seeing the final state of happiness as a state of contemplation. Voluntarism, by contrast, maintains that final happiness is an activity, specifically that of love. The conceptions of theology itself were polarized between these two views. According to intellectualism, theology should be an essentiall speculative science; according to voluntarism, it is a practical science aimed at controlling life, but not necessarily aimed at comprehending philosophic truth.In the modern period Spinoza advocates intellectualism insofar as desire is an indication of imperfection, and the passions are a source of human bondage. When all things are seen purely in rational relations, desire is stilled, the mind is freed from the passions and we experience the intellectual love of God, which is the ideal happiness. According to Leibniz, Spinoza's interpretation of the world as rational and logical left no place for the individual, or for the conception of ends or purposes as a determining factor in reality. Voluntarism is seen in Leibniz's view of the laws which govern monads (individual units of which all reality is composed) in so far as they are the laws of the conscious realization of ends.

19th century voluntarism has its origin in Kant, particularly his doctrine of the "primacy of the practical over the pure reason." Intellectually, humans are incapable of knowing ultimate reality, but this need not and must not interfere with the duty of acting as though the spiritual character of this reality were certain. Freedom cannot be demonstrated speculatively, but whenever a person acts under a motive supplied by reason, he is thereby exhibiting the practical efficiency of reason, and thus showing its reality in a practical sense. Following Kant, two distinct lines of voluntarism have proceeded which may be called rational and irrational voluntarism respectively. For Fichte, the originator of rational voluntarism, the ethical is primary both in the sphere of conduct and in the sphere of knowledge. The whole nature of consciousness can be understood only from the point of view of ends which are set up by the self. The actual world, with all the activity that it has, is only to be understood as material for the activity of the practical reason, as the means through which the will achieves complete freedom and complete moral realization. Schopenhauer's irrational voluntarism asserts a more radical opposition between the will and intellect. For him, the will is by its very nature irrational. It manifests itself in various stages in the world of nature as physical, chemical, magnetic, and vital force, pre-eminently, however, in the animal kingdom in the form of "the will to live," which means the tendency to assert itself in the struggle for means of existence and for reproduction of the species. This activity is all of it blind, so far as the individual agent is concerned, although the power and existence of the will are thereby asserted continually.

Author Information

The author of this article is anonymous. The IEP is actively seeking an author who will write a replacement article.

Vasubandhu (fl. 4th or 5th cn. C.E.)

VasubandhuVasubandhu was a prominent Buddhist teacher and one of the most important figures in the development of Mahyna Buddhism in India. Though he is particularly admired by later Buddhists as co-founder of the Yogcra school along with his half brother Asanga, his pre-Yogcra works, such as the Abhidharmakosha and his auto-commentary (Abhidharmakoshabhshya) on it, are considered masterpieces. He wrote commentaries on many stras, works on logic, devotional poetry, works on Abhidharma classifications, as well as original and innovative philosophical treatises. Some of his writings have survived in their original Sanskrit form, but many others, particularly his commentaries, are extant only in their Chinese or Tibetan translations. Vasubandhu was a many-sided thinker, and his personality as it emerges from his works and his biographies shows him as a man who was not only a great genius and a philosopher, but also a human being who was filled with great compassion.

Table of Contents

  1. Sources on the Biography of Vasubandhu
  2. Early Life of Vasubandhu
  3. Conversion to Mahayana
  4. Intellectual Debates
  5. Date of Vasubandhu
  6. Writings of Vasubandhu
  7. References and Further Readings

1. Sources on the Biography of Vasubandhu

The most important and the only complete account of the life of Vasubandhu entitled Posou pandoufa shijuan (Biography of Master Vasubandhu) was compiled into Chinese by Paramartha (499-569 C.E.), one of the chief exponents of Yogacara doctrine in China. It is preserved in the Chinese Tripitaka and its English translation was published by J. Takakusu in T'oung Pao (1904: 269-296). Apart from this account, the Xiyuji of Xuanzang (600-664 C.E.) also provides important information about the life of Vasubandhu. Though Paramartha and Xuanzang are the two most credible authorities for Vasubandhu's life, yet serious discrepancies exist between their accounts. Paramartha's account not only contains legendary or even mythical elements, but the time sequence of events is also ambiguous and differs greatly in places from the account of Xuanzang's the Xiyuji. The Tibetan historians, Taranatha and Bu-ston, also give some important information on Vasubandhu's life, but their account further disagrees with Paramartha and Xuanzang in terms of certain names and events associated with the life of Vasubandhu. Scholars once suspected that more than one person bore the name Vasubandhu in the history of Indian Buddhism, although recent studies have eliminated this hypothesis.

2. Early Life of Vasubandhu

He was born at Purusapura (identified with modern Peshawar, capital of North-West Frontier Province of Pakistan) in the state of Gandhara. Gandhara is best known today as one of the earliest regions to develop a distinctive form of Buddhist art noted for its Hellenistic influence. According to Taranatha, Vasubandhu was born one year after his older brother Asanga became a Buddhist monk. His father was a brahmanaof the Kaushika gotra. According to Posou pandou fashi zhuan his mother's name was Virinci. But Bu-ston and Taranatha mention the name of the mother of Asanga and Vasubandhu as Prasannashila. According to these two Tibetan historians, Asanga and Vasubandhu were half-brothers; Asanga's father being a kshatriya, and Vasubandhu's a brahmana. Vasubandhu also had a younger brother called Virincivatsa. Vasubandhu's father was a court priest, and according to Taranatha was an authority on the Vedas. In all probability, he officiated at the court of the Shaka princes of the Shilada clan, who at that time ruled from Purusapura. During the formative years of his life, Vasubandhu may have been introduced by his father not only to the Brahmanical tradition but also to the postulates of classical Nyaya and Vaisheshika, both of which had influence on his logical thought.

As a young student, he amazed his teachers with his brilliance and ready wit. According to Paramartha, Vasubandhu's teacher was called Buddhamitra. The Xiyuji, however, never mentions Buddhamitra and names Manoratha as the teacher of Vasubandhu. At Vasubandhu's time the dominant Buddhist school in Gandhara was the Vaibhashika (also called Sarvastivada). Vasubandhu entered the Sarvastivada order, and studied primarily the scholastic system of the Vaibhashikas. Initially, he was quite impressed with the Mahavibhasha. In time, however, Vasubandhu began to have grave doubts about the validity and relevance of Vaibhashika metaphysics. At this time, perhaps through the brilliant teacher Manoratha, he came into contact with the theories of the Sautrantikas, the group of Buddhists who wished to reject everything that was not the express word of the Buddha, and who held the elaborate constructions of the Vibhasha up to ridicule. That there was a strong Sautrantika tradition in Purusapura is likely in view of the fact that it was the birthplace of that maverick philosopher of the second century, Dharmatrata. In fact, the most orthodox Vaibhashika seat of learning was not in Gandhara, but in Kashmir, whose masters looked down upon the Gandharans as quasi-heretics. Therefore, according to Xuanzang's pupil Pu Kuang, Vasubandhu decided to go to Kashmir disguised as a lunatic to investigate the Vaibhashika teachings more deeply. Vasubandhu studied in Kashmir with different teachers for four years and then came back to Purusapura.

After having returned to his native place, Vasubandhu began to prepare for an enormous project that had been in his mind for some time. At this time he was unattached to any particular order, and lived in a small private house in the center of Purusapura. Vasubandhu supported himself by lecturing on Buddhism before the general public, which presumably remunerated him with gifts. According to tradition, during the day he would lecture on Vaibhashika doctrine and in the evening distill the day's lectures into a verse. When collected together the six hundred plus verses (karikas) gave a thorough summary of the entire system. He entitled this work the Abhidharmakosha (Treasury of Abhidharma). According to Paramartha, Vasubandhu composed the Abhidharmakosha at Ayodhya, but according to Xuanzang, it was composed in the suburbs of Purusapura. In the Abhidharmakosha Vasubandhu analyzed and catalogued seventy-five dharmas, the basic factors of experience, for the purposes of attaining Bodhi. He divided them into various categories consisting of eleven types of rupani i.e., ‘material forms' (the five sense organs, their corresponding objects, and avijnapti-rupa i.e., ‘gesture unrevealing of intent'); citta (mind); ten types of mahaabhumika i.e., ‘major groundings' (volition, desire, mindfulness, attention, and so forth); ten types of kushala-mahabhumika i.e., ‘advantageous major groundings' (faith, vigor, equanimity, ahimsa, serenity, and so forth); six types of klesha-mahabhumika i.e., ‘mental disturbance major groundings' (confusion, carelessness, restlessness, and so forth); two types of akushala mahabhumika i.e., ‘nonadvantageous major groundings (shamelessness and non-embarrassment); ten types of paritta-klesha-mahabhumika i.e., ‘secondary mental disturbance major groundings' (anger, enmity, envy, conceit, and so forth); eight types of aniyata-mahabhumika i.e., ‘indeterminate major groundings' (remorse, arrigance, aversion, doubt, torpor, and so forth); fourteen types of citta-viprayukta-samskara-dharmah i.e. ‘embodied-conditioning disassociated from mind' (life-force, birth, decay, impermanence, and so forth); and three types of asamskrita-dharmah i.e., ‘unconditioned dharmas (spatiality, cessation through understanding, and cessation without understanding). Not only were the definitions and interrelations of these seventy-five dharmas analyzed in the Abhidharmakosha, but their karmic qualities also examined. Besides, Vasubandhu also elaborated upon causal theories, cosmology, practices of meditation, theories of perception, karma, rebirth, and the characteristics of an Enlightened Being in this text.

As the Abhidharmakosha was an eloquent summary of the purport of the Mahavibhasha, the Kashmiri Sarvastivadins are reported to have rejoiced to see in it all their doctrines so well propounded. Accordingly, they requested Vasubandhu to write a prose commentary (bhashya) on it. However, it seems that after having written the Abhidharmakosha, Vasubandhu began to have second thoughts about the Vaibhashika teachings. As a consequence, it is said, Vasubandhu prepared the Abhidharmakoshabhashya. But as it contained a thoroughgoing critique of Vaibhashika dogmatics from a Sautrantika viewpoint, the Kashmiri Sarvastivadins soon realized, to their great disappointment, that the Abhidharmakoshabhashya in fact refuted many Sarvastivada theories and upheld the doctrines of the Sautrantika school. One major point that created bad blood between the Vaibhashikas and the Sautrantikas was concerning the status and nature of the dharmas. The Vaibhashikas held that the dharmas exist in the past and future as well as the present. On the other hand, the Sautrantikas held the view that they are discrete, particular moments only existing at the present moment in which they discharge causal efficacy. The Vaibhashikas wrote several treatises attempting to refute Vasubandhu's critiques.

3. Conversion to Mahayana

In the years directly following the composition of the Abhidharmakoshabhashya, Vasubandhu seems to have spent much time in travelling from place to place. Finally, after having spent some time at Shakala/ Shagala (modern Sialkot in Pakistan), he shifted along with his teachers Buddhamitra and Manoratha to Ayodhya (now located in Uttar Pradesh, northern India), a city far removed from Kashmir. According to Posou pandou fashi zhuan, Vasubandhu, now proud of the fame he had acquired, clung faithfully to the Hinayana doctrine in which he was well-versed and, having no faith in the Mahayana, denied that it was the teaching of the Buddha. Vasubandhu had up to this time but little regard for the Yogacara treatises of his elder brother. He had perhaps seen the voluminous Yogacarabhumi compiled by Asanga, which may have simply repelled him by its bulk. According to Bu-ston, he is reported to have said, "Alas, Asanga, residing in the forest, has practised meditation for twelve years. Without having attained anything by this meditation, he has founded a system, so difficult and burdensome, that it can be carried only by an elephant." Asanga heard about this attitude of his brother and feared that Vasubandhu would use his great intellectual gifts to undermine the Mahayana. By feigning illness he was able to summon his younger brother to Purusapura, where he lived. However, Xuanzang differs with some of these details and the place provided by Paramartha regarding Vasubandhu's conversion. According to the Xiyuji the conversion of Vasubandhu took place at Ayodhya. At the rendezvous, Vasubandhu asked Asanga to explain the Mahayana teaching to him, whereupon he immediately realized the supremacy of Mahayana thought. After further study, we are told, the depth of his realization came to equal that of his brother. Deeply ashamed of his former abuse of the Mahayana, Vasubandhu wanted to cut out his tongue, but refrained from doing so when Asanga told him to use it for the cause of Mahayana. Vasubandhu regarded the study of the enormous Shatasahasrikaprajna-paramita-sutra as of utmost importance. In view of the fact that they were the texts that converted him to Mahayana, Vasubandhu's commentaries on the Akshayamatinirdesha-sutra and the Dasha-bhumika may have been his earliest Mahayana works. These were followed by a series of commentaries on other Mahayana sutras and treatises, including the Avatamsakasutra, Nirvanasutra, Vimalakirtinirdeshasutra, and Shrimaladevisutra. He himself composed a treatise on vijnaptimatra (cognition only) theory and commented on the Mahayanasamgraha, Triratna-gotra, Amrita-mukha, and other Mahayana treatises. According to the Tibetan biographers, his favorite sutra was either the Shatasahasrikaprajna-paramita-sutra or the Ashtasahasrika. Considering that these texts reveal the most profound insights into Mahayana thinking, it is not surprising that Vasubandhu liked them. Since the output of Vasubandhu's Mahayana works is huge, he was in all probability writing new treatises every year. According to Posou pandou fashi zhuan Vasubandhu engaged in his literary activity on behalf of the Mahayana after Asanga's death. Xuanzang, however, tells a strange story that suggests that Vasubandhu died before Asanga.

4. Intellectual Debates

With the composition of the Abhidharmakosha, Vasubandhu came to enjoy the patronage and favor of two Gupta rulers, Vikramaditya and his heir Baladitya, who can be identified respectively, as Skandagupta (ruled circa 455-467 C.E.) and Narasimhagupta (ruled circa 467-473 C.E.). The first important intellectual debate which Vasubandhu had was with Vasurata. Vasurata was a grammarian and the husband of the younger sister of Baladitya. It was Baladitya who had challenged Vasubandhu to a debate. Vasubandhu was able to defeat him successfully. Another well-known intellectual encounter which Vasubandhu had was with Samkhyas. While Vasubandhu was away, his old master Buddhamitra was defeated in a debate at Ayodhya by Vindhyavasin. When Vasubandhu came to know of it, he was enraged and subsequently trounced the Samkhyas both in debate and in a treatise the Paramarthasaptatika. Candragupta II rewarded him with 300,000 gold coins for his victory over the Samkhyas. Vasubandhu made use of this money to build three monasteries, one for the Mahayanists, another one for his old colleagues the Sarvastivadins, and a third for nuns. Refutation of Vaisheshika and Samkhya theories had been presented by Vasubandhu already in the Abhidharmakosha, but it was perhaps from this point onward that Vasubandhu was regarded as a philosopher whose views could not be lightly challenged. Samghabhadra, a Sarvastivada scholar from Kashmir, also once challenged Vasubandhu regarding the Abhidharmakosha. He composed two treatises, one consisting of 10,000 verses and another of 120,000 verses. According to Xuanzang, it took twelve years for Samghabhadra to finish the two works. He challenged Vasubandhu to a debate, but Vasubandhu refused, saying, "I am already old, so I will let you say what you wish. Long ago, this work of mine destroyed the Vaibhashika (that is, the Sarvastivada) doctrines. There is no need now of confronting you... Wise men will know which of us is right and which one is wrong."

5. Date of Vasubandhu

The date of Vasubandhu has posed a problem for historians. According to Paramartha, Vasubandhu lived 900 years after the Mahaparinirvana of the Buddha. At another place, Paramartha also mentions the figure of 1100. Xuanzang and his disciples respectively mention that Vasubandhu lived 1000 and 900 years after the Mahaparinirvana of the Buddha. Now though it is generally believed that the Mahaparinirvana of the Buddha took place within few years of 400 B.C.E., some scholars are still hesitant to accept this date. This has led to different scholars proposing different dates for Vasubandhu. Noul Pari and Shio Benkyoo give as Vasubandhu's dates the years 270 to 350 C.E.. Steven Anacker proposes his date as 316-396 C.E., Ui Hakuju places him in the fourth century (320-400 C.E.). Takakusu Junjiroo and Kimura Taiken gave 420 to 500, Wogihara Unrai gives 390 to 470 C.E., and Hikata Ryushoo gives 400 to 480 C.E. Erich Frauwallner suggests that there were two Vasubandhus and hence two different dates. According to him Vasubandhu the elder lived between about 320 and 380 C.E. and Vasubandhu the younger between around 400 and 480 C.E. However, this hypothesis of two Vasubandhus is no longer tenable in current scholarship as many of the early Chinese documents used by Frauwallner are of spurious nature and thus, their testimony cannot be accepted.

6. Writings of Vasubandhu

Vasubandhu is said to have been the author of one thousand works, 500 in the Hinayana tradition and 500 Mahayana treatises. But only forty-seven works of Vasubandhu are extant, nine of which survive in the Sanskrit original, twenty-seven in Chinese translation, and thirty-three in Tibetan translation. The Abhidharmakosha is the most voluminous among Vasubandhu's independent expositions. It attained the status of a primary textbook to be studied by all students of the tradition in the Northern Buddhist countries, including Tibet. As pointed out above, the Abhidharmakosha pictures the Buddhist Path to Enlightenment through the categorization and analysis of the seventy-five dharmas.

Vasubandhu's Karmasiddhi (Establishing Karma) is a short, quasi-Hinayana treatise coloured, as is the Abhidharmakosha, by Sautrantika leanings. His Pancaskandhaprakarana (Exposition on the Five Aggregates) discusses most of the subjects taken up in the Abhidharmakosha. In cataloguing and categorization of dharmas in the Pancaskandhaprakarana the dharmas is a bit different than the Abhidharmakosha. Moreover, whereas the Abhidharmakosha talks about seventy five dharmas, not only have several dharmas been added, but many of the original seventy five have been dropped in the Pancaskandhaprakarana.

In his Karmasiddhiprakarana (Exposition on Establishing Karma), Vasubandhu challenged the views of those who held that dharmas are anything other than being momentary. The doctrine of momentariness (kshanikavada) perceived consciousness as a causal sequence of moments in which each moment is caused by its immediate predecessor. However, he felt that this theory could not explain certain categories of continuity. For instance, kshanikavada did not offer any satisfactory explanation for the re-emergence of a consciousness stream after having been interrupted in deep sleep. Similarly, continuity from one life to the next could not be explained satisfactorily by this theory. To solve such inconsistencies, Vasubandhu introduced the Yogacara notion of the alaya vijnana (storehouse consciousness). Through this concept he explained that the seed (bija) of a previous experience is stored subliminally and released into a new experience. In this way, Vasubandhu not only explained continuity between two separate moments of consciousness, but he also provided a quasi causal explanation for the functioning of karmic retribution. In other words, Vasubandhu's alaya vijnana provided an explanation as to how an action performed at one time could produce its result at another time. This concept also did away with the necessity of a permanent atman as the doer and recipient of karma since, like a stream, it is continuously changing with new conditions from moment to moment.

From the Yogacara point of view the most important of Vasubandhu's works are the Vimshatika (Twenty Verses), Trimshika (Thirty Verses), and Trisvabhavanirdesha (Exposition on the Three Natures). According to tradition, the Trisvabhavanirdesha was reputedly his last treatise, and his Vimshatika and Trimshika were written near the end of his life, though we have no actual evidence to support this order. Despite the fact that all these three texts are very concise and the Trisvabhavanirdesha was not even known in China (and is never read in Tibet despite being part of Tibetan canon), they form a kind of troika and represent Vasubandhu's final accomplishment as a Yogacara-Vijnanavada teacher.

The Vimshatika is perhaps the most original and philosophically interesting treatise of Vasubandhu. Vasubandhu devotes a major portion of this text in dealing with the Realist objections against Yogacara. To the Realist position that external things must exist because they are consistently located in space as well as time, Vasubandhu responds by saying that objects also appear to have spatial and temporal qualities in dreams, whereas nothing ‘external' is present in the dreams. This means that the appearance of cognitive objects does not require an actual object external to the consciousness cognizing it. Vasubandhu, however, points out that without the consciousness nothing whatsoever can be apprehended. Therefore, it is consciousness that is the necessary condition and not an external object. Vasubandhu does not deny that cognitive objects exist. However, what he denies is that such cognitive objects have external reference points. From the Yogacara point of view, what we believe to be external objects are actually nothing more than mental projections. Thus, whatever we think about, know, experience, or conceptualize, occurs to us only in our consciousness and nowhere else. In other words, according to Vasubandhu, cognition takes place only in consciousness and nowhere else. Thus, everything that we know is acquired through sensory experience. We are fooled by consciousness into believing that those things which we perceive and appropriate within consciousness are actually outside our cognitive sphere. To the Realist objection that subjective wishes do not determine objective realities, Vasubandhu replies that due to collective-karma groups give rise to common misperceptions. He pointed out that it is the result of a person's own karma that determines the type of situation in which that person would be born. Thus, Vasubandhu points out that how we see things is shaped by previous experience, and since experience is inter-subjective, we gather in groups that see things the way we do. To another Realist objection that the objective world functions by determinate causal principles, Vasubandhu points out that the appearance of causal efficacy also occurs in dreams. Thus our conscious ‘dreams' can have causal efficacy.

The Trimshika, which became the basic text of the Faxiang (Japanese Hossoo) school, is one of Vasubandhu's most mature works. Through concise verses he sums up his doctrine of vijnapti matra (cognition only) by explaining Yogacara theories of eight-consciousnesses, three-natures and the five-step path to Enlightenment. The eight types of consciousness are the five sense consciousnesses, the empirical consciousness (mano-vijnana), a self-aggrandizing mentality (manas), and the alaya-vijnana. Vasubandhu describes and explains how each of these can be extinguished through ashraya-paravritti i.e., through the overturning of the very basis of these eight types of consciousness. This over-turning i.e., achievement of the Bodhi gradually takes place through the five-step path in a way that consciousness (vijnana) is transformed into unmediated cognition (jnana). According to the theory of three natures, there are three cognitive realms at play: the delusional cognitively constructed realm, which is intrinsically unreal; the realm of causal dependency; and the perfectional realm which is intrinsically ‘empty.' To Vasubandhu, Buddhism is a method of cleansing the stream of consciousness from ‘contaminations' and ‘defilements.’

The Foxinglun (Treatise on Buddha Nature) exerted great influence on Sino-Japanese Buddhism by propounding the concept of tathagata-garbha (Buddha Nature). The Vadavidhi (A Method for Argumentation) is another important text attributed to Vasubandhu. Though this text is not strictly speaking a ‘logic' text and does not make any distinction between techniques of debate and logic as such, still its importance in the field of logic cannot be overlooked. It not only provides information on the state of Buddhist logic prior to Dignaga, but also paved the way for the revolutionary contribution of Dignaga and Dharmakirti in the field of logic. Though not many details on the meditative career of Vasubandhu are available, his Madhyantavibhagabhashya (Commentary on the Separation of the Middle from Extremes) points to his keen interest in the techniques of meditation.

Vasubandhu's commentaries on sutras and shastras are by no means less important than the above-mentioned independent treatises. He wrote commentaries on three treatises: the Madhyantavibhaga (Discrimination between the Middle and the Extremes), Mahayanasutralamkara (Ornament of the Mahayana Sutras), and Dharmadharmatavibhaga/ Dharmadharmtavibhanga (Discrimination between Existence and Essence). All these three treatises are important texts of the Yogacara school and are ascribed to Asanga's teacher Maitreya. Vasubandhu also composed a commentary on Asanga's Mahayanasamgraha (Compendium of Mahayana). It is the first methodical presentation of the doctrines of Yogacara-Vijnanavada. Vasubandhu's Sukhavativyuhasutranirdesha (Commentary on the Sukhavativyuha Sutra) is another important text. This text became a fundamental treatise of the Pure Land faith in China and Japan. The Indian Yogacara-Vijnanavada is represented in China by three schools, and the development of all these schools is credited to the works of Vasubandhu. The first of these schools, called the Dilun school (which was established in the first half of the sixth century C.E.), took his Dashabhumikasutranirdesha (Commentary on the Dashabhumika Sutra) as its basic text. The second, the Shelun school which originated in the second half of the sixth century C.E., developed around a translation of the Mahayanasamgraha done by Paramartha. The third school, known as the Faxiang school (founded by Xuanzang and his disciple Kuiji in the seventh century), adopted the Trimshika as its basic text.

Later in life, Vasubandhu went so far ahead with his contemplative exercises that he even refused to engage in a debate with his worthy opponent Samghabhadra. He died at the age of eighty. Paramartha says that he died at Ayodhya, whereas Bu-ston says that his death took place in the northern frontier countries, which he calls ‘Nepal.' In recognition of his contribution and achievements as a Mahayana teacher, he came to be reverently called a bodhisattva in various traditions from India to China. In fact, some go to the extent of even calling him the ‘second Buddha.' As rightly pointed out in Bu-ston, he "was possessed of the wealth (vasu of the Highest wisdom and, having propagated the Doctrine out of mercy, had become the friend (bandhu) of the living beings."

7. References and Further Readings

  • Anacker, Steven. Seven Works of Vasubandhu. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass, 1984.
  • Duerlinger, James. Indian Buddhist Theories of Person: Vasubandhu's Refutation of the Theory of a Self. London: RoutledgeCurzon, 2003.
  • Frauwallner, Erich. On the Date of the Buddhist Master of the Law, Vasubandhu. Rome: IsMeo, 1951.
  • Hall, Bruce C. "The Meaning of Vijnapti in Vasubandhu's Concept of Mind." Journal of the International Association of Buddhist Studies 9 (1986): 7-23.
  • Chimpa, Lama, and A. Chattopadhyaya, trans. Taranatha's History of Buddhism in India. Simla: Indian Institute of Advanced Study, 1970.
  • Jaini, Padmanabh S. "On the Theory of Two Vasubandhus." Bulletin of the School of Oriental and African Studies 21 (1958): 48-53.
  • Kaplan, Stefan. "A Holographic Alternative to a Traditional Yogacara Simile: An Analysis of Vasubandhu's Trisvabhava Doctrine." Eastern Buddhist 23 (1990): 56-78.
  • Kochumuttom, Thomas. A Buddhist Doctrine of Experience: A New Translation and Interpretation of the Works of Vasubandhu the Yogacarin. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass, 1982.
  • Kritzer, Robert. "Vasubandhu on samapratyaya vijnanamam." Journal of the International Association of Buddhist Studies 16/1 (1993): 24-55.
  • Levi, Sylvain. Un systeme de philosophie bouddhique: Materiaux pour l`etude du systeme Vijnaptimatra.Paris: Bibliotheque de l`ecole des Hautes Etudes, fasc. 260, 1932.
  • Lusthaus, Dan. Buddhist Phenomenology: A Philosophical Investigation of Yogacara Buddhism and the Ch'eng wei shih lun. London: Curzon, 2000.
  • Obermiller, E., trans. The History of Buddhism in India and Tibet by Bu-Ston. 2nd rev. ed. Delhi: Sri Satguru Publications, 1986.
  • Poussin, Louis de la Vallee, trans. L'Abhidharmakosha de Vasubandhu. 6 vols. Bruxelles, 1971 [reprint].
  • Pruden, Leo, trans. Abhidharma Kosha Bhashyam. 4 vols. Berkeley: Asian Humanities Press, 1988-90.
  • Ryushoo, Hikata. "A Reconsideration on the Date of Vasubandhu." Bulletin of the Faculty of the Kyushu University 4 (1956): 53-74.
  • Takakusu, J. "A Study of Paramartha's Life of Vasubandhu and the Date of Vasubandhu." Journal of the Royal Asiatic Society (1905): 33-53.
  • Tola, Fernando, and Carmen Dragonetti, eds. "The Trisvabhavakarika of Vasubandhu." Journal of Indian Philosophy 11 (1983): 225-266.
  • Waldron, William S. The Buddhist Unconsciousness: The alaya-vijnana in the Context of Indian Buddhist Thought. London: RoutledgeCurzon, 2003.
  • Yamada, Isshi. "Vijnaptimatrata of Vasubandhu." Journal of the Royal Asiatic Society (1977): 158-176.

Author Information

K. T. S. Sarao
Email: ktssarao@hotmail.com
Delhi University
India

Diels-Kranz Numbering System

Of the writings of the Presocratics, only quotations embedded in the works of later authors have survived. These quotations, along with reports about the Presocratics and imitations of their works, were first compiled into a standard edition (Die Fragmente der Vorsokratiker) in the nineteenth century by Hermann Diels (1848-1922) with revisions by Walther Kranz and subsequent editors, in a complete edition of all the works of Presocratic authors which has become standard in the field of ancient philosophy. The works of Presocratics, therefore, are normally referred to by DK numbers. In Diels-Kranz, each author is assigned a number, and within that author's number, entries are divided into three groups labeled alphabetically:

  1. testimonia: ancient accounts of the authors' life and doctrines
  2. ipsissima verba (literally, exact words, sometimes also termed "fragments"): the exact words of the author
  3. imitations: works which take the author as a model

Within each of these three groups, individual fragments or testimonia are assigned sequential numbers. So, for example, since Protagoras is the eightieth author in Diels-Kranz, the third testimony concerning him, a generally unreliable short biography by Hesychius, would be referred to as DK80a3.

Diels, Hermann and Walther Kranz. Die Fragmente der Vorsokratiker. Zurich: Weidmann, 1985.

Freeman, Kathleen. Ancilla to the Pre-Socratic Philosophers. Cambridge: Harvard Univ Pr., 1983 (reprint edition).

This book is a complete English translation of the 'b' passages--the so-called 'fragments'--from Die Fragmente der Vorsokratiker.

Author Information

Carol Poster
Email: cposter@english.fsu.edu
Florida State University

Carneades (c. 214–129 B.C.E.)

carneadesCarneades was perhaps the most prominent head of the skeptical Academy in ancient Greece. Following the example of Arcesilaus, who turned the Academy in a skeptical direction, Carneades developed an array of arguments against the dogmatic positions upheld by other philosophers, particularly the Stoics. He went beyond Arcesilaus in several respects, however. Instead of simply arguing against the positive positions of other philosophers, Carneades also set forth arguments of his own in favor of views that sometimes had never been defended before--not in order to establish their truth, but simply to counterbalance the arguments of the dogmatists and show that none of their conclusions can be conclusively established. In doing so, Carneades made important contributions to several philosophical debates. Carneades also set forth a more detailed skeptical criterion of what to believe, to pithanon which means either the "plausible" or the "probable."

Table of Contents

  1. Skeptical Practice
  2. Contributions to Philosophical Debates
  3. Practical Criterion: To Pithanon

1. Skeptical Practice

Carneades continued the skeptical academy's attack upon Stoic epistemology. Arcesilaus had argued against Zeno, the founder of Stoicism, that no sense-impressions could provide a firm foundation for knowledge, since sense-impressions are always fallible. Carneades maintained this criticism against refinements in the Stoics' theory made by Chrysippus, the head of the Stoa at his time. But Carneades went beyond criticizing the arguments of other philosophers by trying to propound equally convincing arguments for incompatible conclusions, which would have the effect of leaving his interlocutor suspending judgement as to which is true. For instance, while on a mission to Rome with the heads of two other philosophical schools, Carneades gave an eloquent defense of traditional views on justice one day, and the next day offered an equally eloquent attack on those same views. (Unamused traditionalist Romans expelled the philosophers from the city as a result.)

2. Contributions to Philosophical Debates

In arguing for contrary positions, Carneades sometimes came up with novel positions or arguments. For instance, Carneades gave a taxonomy of different possible candidates for what the highest good could be, and in so doing, came up with possibilities not canvassed by previous philosophers. He also defended original views in the debate between the Stoics and Epicureans on human freedom, determinism, and the truth-values of statements about the future. Against both Epicurus and the Stoics, Carneades argued that no deterministic consequences follow from the principle of bivalence (the principle that for any statement P, either P is true or P is false). That is because, even if it has always been true that e.g., I will brush my teeth tomorrow, that does not imply that there are "immutable eternal causes" which will bring it about that I will do so. It can be true now simply in virtue of the fact that brushing my teeth is actually what I will freely choose to do. Similarly, Carneades said that Epicureans can defend human freedom from causal determinism without positing a random atomic swerve. A person can be the cause of his actions by a "free movement of the mind", without there being antecedent causes that necessitate that the agent will do what he does. This is reminiscent of the theories of "agent-causation" later propounded by writers like Chisholm.

3. Practical Criterion: To Pithanon

Carneades also developed a detailed skeptical criterion, to pithanon--which can mean either "the plausible" or "the probable." Sense-impressions can never be a sure guide to truth, thought Carneades, but some are still more convincing to us than others--some seem plausible, and others not. We need not stop there however--we can make further investigation of convincing impressions to see if they stand up or not, as well as seeing whether they cohere with our other sense-impressions.

Exactly how to understand Carneades' criterion was controversial even in his own day. Carneades left no writings, other than a few letters, and Clitomachus, who was Carneades' closest associate and succeeded him as head of the Academy, said he did not know what Carneades really thought. Two questions are: (1) Are pithanon beliefs supposed to be more likely to be true (as Cicero and Philo thought), or simply more plausible to the person who accepts them? (2) Is Carneades advocating to pithanon in his own voice as a criterion that a skeptic could use, or is he simply employing it in service of his arguments against the Stoics, without being committed to it himself?

For more information on Carneades, see the section on him in the entry on ancient Greek skepticism.

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Arcesilaus (c. 315—240 B.C.E.)

Arcesilaus was the sixth head of Plato's academy. He turned the academy in a skeptical direction. After Plato's death, the headship of the academy passed to a series of men who developed metaphysical and ethical systems inspired by the positive arguments contained in dialogues such as the Republic and the Phaedo. Arcesilaus, however, turned away from such system-building and instead spent his energies in attacking the arguments of others. According to Cicero, the aim of such attacks was to produce epoche, or suspension of judgment.

Some later commentators claim that by making this skeptical turn, Arcesilaus abandoned Platonism. However, sympathetic writers like the academic skeptic Cicero assert that much of Plato's writings are actually more in harmony with Arcesilaus' practice than with dogmatic system-building. In dialogues like the Euthyphro and Laches, Socrates is shown questioning other people's definitions of terms such as piety and courage. In so doing, Socrates shows that they do not know what they think that they know. However, Socrates' questioning does not lead to positive answers to the questions he raises. In the Apology Socrates claims that he has no knowledge of his own, but that he is wiser than other people only insofar as he knows that he does not know, whereas others are ignorant even of their own ignorance. Arcesilaus goes beyond this, saying that he knows nothing, not even that that he knows nothing. Later academic skeptics like Cicero also stress the tentative and exploratory nature of dialogues like the Republic: although they do contain positive arguments, the dialogue form, the back-and-forth among the speakers, and Socrates' own disavowals at many points of having conclusively established what he argues for should make us wary of looking at the dialogues as treatises that expound Platonic doctrine.

The Stoics were the main target of Arcesilaus' attacks. The founder of Stoicism, Zeno of Citium, developed a systematic and elaborate metaphysics, ethics, and epistemology. Zeno claimed that there are certain sense-impressions—so-called kataleptic or "graspable" impressions—which are the foundation and criterion of knowledge. These impressions come from objects in the environment and accurately represent these objects. The Stoics also thought that the wise person would never assent to what is uncertain, and thus would never be mistaken. Arcesilaus argued that, according to the Stoics' own standards, the Stoic wise person would never assent to anything, since no sense-impression is ever infallible. For any sense-impression, Arcesilaus said, even if it is accurate, it is always possible in principle that there be a qualitatively indistinguishable sense-impression that is inaccurate, and the wise person would thus have no way of telling which sense-impressions are accurate andwhich ones are not.

The Stoics thought that without a criterion for knowledge, it would be impossible to have any basis on which to act. Arcesilaus, however, said that we can act on the basis the eulogon—the "reasonable." The eulogon is not a criterion of knowledge, since what is eulogon can be mistaken, but it can be a basis of action.

Arcesilaus left no writings of his own, so we must rely on second and third-hand reports in order to reconstruct his views. Even in ancient times, however, Arcesilaus' views were heavily debated. One major question is whether Arcesilaus himself thought that it is impossible to gain knowledge, or just that it is impossible, given the assumptions of the Stoics about the nature of knowledge. Similarly, it is not clear whether Arcesilaus advanced the eulogon as his own skeptical criterion for action, or whether he simply advanced it to rebut Stoic claims about the necessity of a criterion of knowledge for action.

For more information on Arcesilaus, see the section on him in the entry on ancient Greek skepticism.

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Damon (5th cn. B.C.E.)

Damon was a Pythagorean philosopher of Syracuse. Damon was a close friend to Phintias the Pythagorean. Dionysius, the tyrant, having condemned Phintias to death for conspiring against him, Phintias begged that leave might be allowed him to go for a short period to a neighboring place, in order to arrange some family affairs, and offered to leave one of his friends in the hands of Dionysius as a pledge for his return by an appointed time, and who would be willing, in case Phintias broke his word, to die in his stead. Dionysius, skeptical as to the existence of such friendship, and prompted by curiosity, assented to the arrangement, and Damon took the place of Phintias. The day appointed for the return of Phintias arrived, and the public expectation was highly excited as to the probable issue of this singular affair. The day drew to a close; no Phintias came; and Damon was in the act of being led to execution, when, of a sudden, the absent friend, who had been detained by unforeseen and unavoidable obstacles, presented imself to the eyes of the admiring crowd and saved the life of Damon. Dionysius was so much struck by this instance of true attachment that he pardoned Phintias, and entreated the two to allow him to share their friendship (Val. Max. iv. 7; Plut. De Amic Mult.).

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Aenesidemus (1st cn. C.E.)

Aenesidemus was the founder of Pyrrhonian Skepticism. He was born at Gnossus in Crete, but lived at Alexandria and flourished shortly after Cicero. Aenesidemus originally was a member of Plato's Academy. From the time of Arcesilaus through Carneades, at least, the Academy was skeptical. By the time of Aenesidemus, however, the Academy had splintered into several competing factions and considerably softened or even abandoned its skepticism, as a result of its dialectical interchange with the Stoics. One head of the Academy, Philo, turned to a form of moderate fallibilism, in which one could assent to many beliefs and gain knowledge, although not certainty, while a later head, Antiochus, propounded a dogmatic and syncretistic philosophy, claiming that at bottom Plato, the Stoics, and many other philosophers were really saying the same thing.

Aenesidemus complained that the situation had deteriorated to the point where the Academics were no more than "Stoics in conflict with Stoics," and he broke with the Academy and founded his own school, taking Pyrrho as its namesake. To strengthen the cause of skepticism, he developed the ten tropes or modes of skepticism—a set of skeptical argument forms, or modes, to show that judgment must be withheld on any issue. All are based on some form of relativity—e.g., the same object can give rise to different perceptions, depending on the bodily condition of the percipient--conjoined with the claim that there is no criterion by which to adjudicate which of the perceptions, customs, etc., are correct. Although Diogenes Laertius attributes the ten modes to Pyrrho, it is likely that they owe their existence to Aenesidemus. Extracts of the ten modes are found in Photius.

Briefly, the ten modes are as follows: (1) The feelings and perceptions of all living beings differ. (2) People have physical and mental differences, which make things appear different to them. (3) The different senses give different impressions of things. (4) Our perceptions depend on our physical and intellectual conditions at the time of perception. (5) Things appear different in different positions, and at different distances. (6) Perception is never direct, but always through a medium. For example, we see things through the air. (7) Things appear different according to variations in their quantity, color, motion, and temperature. (8) A thing impresses us differently when it is familiar and when it is unfamiliar. (9) All supposed knowledge is predication. All predicates give us only the relation of things to other things or to ourselves; they never tell us what the thing in itself is. (10) The opinions and customs of people are different in different countries.

For more information on Aenesidemus, see the section on him in the entry on Ancient Greek Skepticism.

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Democritus (460—370 B.C.E.)

democritusDemocritus was born at Abdera, about 460 BCE, although according to some 490. His father was from a noble family and of great wealth, and contributed largely towards the entertainment of the army of Xerxes on his return to Asia. As a reward for this service the Persian monarch gave and other Abderites presents and left among them several Magi. Democritus, according to Diogenes Laertius, was instructed by these Magi in astronomy and theology. After the death of his father he traveled in search of wisdom, and devoted his inheritance to this purpose, amounting to one hundred talents. He is said to have visited Egypt, Ethiopia, Persia, and India. Whether, in the course of his travels, he visited Athens or studied under Anaxagoras is uncertain. During some part of his life he was instructed in Pythagoreanism, and was a disciple of Leucippus. After several years of traveling, Democritus returned to Abdera, with no means of subsistence. His brother Damosis, however, took him in. According to the law of Abdera, whoever wasted his patrimony would be deprived of the rites of burial. Democritus, hoping to avoid this disgrace, gave public lectures. Petronius relates that he was acquainted with the virtues of herbs, plants, and stones, and that he spent his life in making experiments upon natural bodies. He acquired fame with his knowledge of natural phenomena, and predicted changes in the weather. He used this ability to make people believe that he could predict future events. They not only viewed him as something more than mortal, but even proposed to put him in control of their public affairs. He preferred a contemplative to an active life, and therefore declined these public honors and passed the remainder of his days in solitude.

Credit cannot be given to the tale that Democritus spent his leisure hours in chemical researches after the philosopher's stone -- the dream of a later age; or to the story of his conversation with Hippocrates concerning Democritus's supposed madness, as based on spurious letters. Democritus has been commonly known as "The Laughing Philosopher," and it is gravely related by Seneca that he never appeared in public with out expressing his contempt of human follies while laughing. Accordingly, we find that among his fellow-citizens he had the name of "the mocker". He died at more than a hundred years of age. It is said that from then on he spent his days and nights in caverns and sepulchers, and that, in order to master his intellectual faculties, he blinded himself with burning glass. This story, however, is discredited by the writers who mention it insofar as they say he wrote books and dissected animals, neither of which could be done well without eyes.

Democritus expanded the atomic theory of Leucippus. He maintained the impossibility of dividing things ad infinitum. From the difficulty of assigning a beginning of time, he argued the eternity of existing nature, of void space, and of motion. He supposed the atoms, which are originally similar, to be impenetrable and have a density proportionate to their volume. All motions are the result of active and passive affection. He drew a distinction between primary motion and its secondary effects, that is, impulse and reaction. This is the basis of the law of necessity, by which all things in nature are ruled. The worlds which we see -- with all their properties of immensity, resemblance, and dissimilitude -- result from the endless multiplicity of falling atoms. The human soul consists of globular atoms of fire, which impart movement to the body. Maintaining his atomic theory throughout, Democritus introduced the hypothesis of images or idols (eidola), a kind of emanation from external objects, which make an impression on our senses, and from the influence of which he deduced sensation (aesthesis) and thought (noesis). He distinguished between a rude, imperfect, and therefore false perception and a true one. In the same manner, consistent with this theory, he accounted for the popular notions of Deity; partly through our incapacity to understand fully the phenomena of which we are witnesses, and partly from the impressions communicated by certain beings (eidola) of enormous stature and resembling the human figure which inhabit the air. We know these from dreams and the causes of divination. He carried his theory into practical philosophy also, laying down that happiness consisted in an even temperament. From this he deduced his moral principles and prudential maxims. It was from Democritus that Epicurus borrowed the principal features of his philosophy.

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Demonax (2nd cn. C.E.)

Demonax was a philosopher of the second century CE. who tried to revive the philosophy of the Cynic School. Born in Cyprus, Demonax went to Athens, where he became so popular that people vied with on another in presenting him with food, and even the young children gave him great quantities of fruit. Much less austere than Diogenes, whom he took as his philosophic model, he nevertheless rebuked vice unsparingly, and was charged with neglecting the Eleusinian Mysteries, to which he replied: "If the mysteries are bad, no one should be initiated; and if they are good, they ought to be open to everyone." He was friend of Epictetus, who once rebuked him for not marrying, but was silenced by Demonax, who said, "Very well; give me one of your daughters for a wife" -- Epictetus being himself a bachelor. Demonax lived to be nearly a hundred, and on his death was buried with great magnificence. See the Demonax of Lucian, in which the character of the philosopher is painted in glowing colors.

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Denis Diderot (1713—1784)

diderot

Denis Diderot was the most prominent of the French Encyclopedists. He was educated by the Jesuits, and, refusing to enter one of the learned professions, was turned adrift by his father and came to Paris, where he lived from hand to mouth for a time. Gradually, however, he became recognized as one of the most powerful writers of the day. His first independent work was the Essai sur le merite et la vertu (1745). As one of the editors of the Dictionnaire de medecine (6 vols., Paris, 1746), he gained valuable experience in encyclopedic system. His Pensees philosophiques (The Hague, 1746), in which he attacked both atheism and the received Christianity, was burned by order of the Parliament of Paris.

In the circle of the leaders of the Enlightenment, Diderot's name became known especially by his Lettre sur les aveugles (London, 1749), which supported Locke's theory of knowledge. He attacked the conventional morality of the day, with the result (to which possibly an allusion to the mistress of a minister contributed) that he was imprisoned at Vincennes for three months. He was released by the influence of Voltaire's friend Mme. du Chatelet, and thenceforth was in close relation with the leaders of revolutionary thought. He had made very little pecuniary profit out of the Encyclopedie, and Grimm appealed on his behalf to Catherine of Russia, who in 1765 bought his library, allowing him the use of the books as long as he lived, and assigning him a yearly salary which a little later she paid him for fifty years in advance.

In 1773 she summoned him to St. Petersburg with Grimm to converse with him in person. On his return he lived until his death in a house provided by her, in comparative retirement but in unceasing labor on the undertakings of his party, writing (according to Grimm) two-thirds of Raynal's famous Histoire philosophique, and contributing some of the most rhetorical pages to Helvetius's De l'esprit and Holbach's Systeme de la nature Systeme social, and Alorale universelle. His numerous writings include the most varied forms of literary effort, from inept licentious tales and comedies which pointed away from the stiff classical style of the French drama and strongly influenced Lessing, to the most daring ethical and metaphysical speculations. Like his famous contemporary Samuel Johnson, he is said to have been more effective as a talker than as a writer; and his mental qualifications were rather those of a stimulating force than of a reasoned philosopher. His position gradually changed from theism to deism, then to materialism, and finally rested in a pantheistic sensualism. In Sainte-Beuve's phrase, he was " the first great writer who belonged wholly and undividedly to modern democratic society," and his attacks on the political system of France were among the most potent causes of the Revolution.

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Diogenes Laertius (3rd cn. C.E.)

Diogenes Laertius, native of Laerte in Cilicia, was a biographer of ancient Greek philosophers. His Lives of the Philosophers (Philosophoi Biol), in ten books, is still extant and is an important source of information on the development of Greek philosophy. The period when he lived is not exactly known, but it is supposed to have been during the reigns of Septimius Severus and Caracalla. Because of his long and fairly sympathetic account of Epicurus, some think that Diogenes belonged to the Epicurean School, but this is not clear. He expresses his admiration for many philosophers, but his own allegiances, if any, are not stated.

He divides all the Greek philosophers into two classes: those of the Ionic and those of the Italic school. He derives the first from Anaximander, the second from Pythagoras. After Socrates, he divides the Ionian philosophers into three branches: (a) Plato and the Academics, down to Clitomachus; (b) the Cynics, down to Chrysippus; (c) Aristotle and Theophrastus. The series of Italic philosophers consists, after Pythagoras, of the following: Telanges, Xenophanes, Parmenides, Zeno of Elea, Leucippus, Democritus, and others down to Epicurus. The first seven books are devoted to the Ionic philosophers; the last three treat of the Italic school.

The work of Diogenes is a crude contribution towards the history of philosophy. It contains a brief account of the lives, doctrines, and sayings of most persons who have been called philosophers; and though the author is limited in his philosophical abilities and assessment of the various schools, the book is valuable as a collection of facts, which we could not have learned from any other source, and is entertaining as a sort of pot-pourri on the subject. Diogenes also includes samples of his own wretched poetry about the philosophers he discusses.

Diogenes is generally as reliable as whatever source he happens to be copying from at that moment. Especially when Diogenes is setting down amusing or scandalous stories about the lives and deaths of various philosophers which are supposed to serve as fitting illustrations of their thought, the reader should be wary. The article on Epicurus, however, is quite valuable, since it contains some original letters of that philosopher, which comprise a summary of the Epicurean doctrines.

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English Deism

Table of Contents

  1. Lord Herbert of Cherbury
  2. Hobbes and Others
  3. Charles Blount
  4. John Locke
  5. Toland, Collins, and Others
  6. Matthew Tindal
  7. Morgan, Annet, and Middleton
  8. Shaftesbury, Mandeville, Dodwell, Bolingbroke
  9. Hume's Influence

1. Lord Herbert of Cherbury

The beginnings of English Deism appear in the seventeenth century. Its main principles are to be found in the writings of Lord Herbert of Cherbury (d. 1648), who devoted the latter part of a life spent in a military and diplomatic career to a search for a standard and a guide in the conflicts of creeds and systems. He was a friend of Grotius, Casaubon, and Gassendi, and during a long sojourn in France made himself acquainted with the thought of Montaigne, of Bodin, and especially of Charron. His works are: De Veritate (Paris, 1624); Cherbury. De religions Gentilium errorumque apud eos causes (London, 1645); and two minor treatises, De cause errorum and De religions laici. The first work advances a theory of knowledge based upon the recognition of innate universal characteristics on the object perceived, and rigidly opposed to knowledge supernatural in its origin and determinable in only by strife and conflict. The second work lays down the common marks by which religious truth is recognized. These are (1) a belief in the existence of the Deity, (2) the obligation to reverence such a power, (3) the identification of worship with practical morality, (4) the obligation to repent of sin and to abandon it, and, (5) divine recompense in this world and the next. These five essentials (the so-called "Five Articles" of the English Deists) constitute the nucleus of all religions and of Christianity in its primitive, uncorrupted form. The variations between positive religions are explained as due partly to the allegorization of nature, partly to self-deception, the workings of imagination, and priestly guile.

2. Hobbes and Others

Rejection of theological supernaturalism stands out as the most conspicuous characteristic in Hobbes's philosophical writings (d. 1679), which were inspired by the teachings of the new mathematical and natural sciences. The different religions are explained as the product of human fear interpreting natural phenomena in anthropomorphic form, or, in their higher aspects, as the outcome of reflection on causal relation in the universe. Miracles and revelations are in themselves improbable, and may be most easily explained as the imaginings of the ignorant. Positive religion is the creation of the State, and the sovereign justly possesses unconditional power to enforce its prescriptions, for only in this way can religious strife be avoided. Between religion thus naturally explained and a prophetic and Christian revelation Hobbes, nevertheless, attempted to mediate; he mentions as the means that might lead to such a reconciliation the rational interpretation of miracles, the differentiation between the inner moral sense of Scripture and mere figurative expression, and the historical criticisms of Biblical sources. The entire apparatus of Rationalism is here to be found, limited only in its application. Further, Spinoza's Tractatus theologico-politicus (1670) and Bayle's Dictionnaire (1695-97) were effective in shaping the character of Deism. Of no small importance, also, was the rise of a literature of comparative religion and the publication of ethnographical studies and works of travel. China, Arabia, Egypt, Persia, India, and primal regions, were brought within the horizon of religious investigation. Philosophy, beginning with Locke's theory of knowledge, and natural science, with Newton's theory of gravitation, contributed to the opposition with which theological dogma was confronted. Yet their attitude was not one of hostility to religions which they sought rather to utilize for the purpose of establishing the desired universal standard of truth. Newton and Boyle succeeded in reconciling the creed of the Church with their mechanical metaphysics; and this union remained characteristic of England, so that even men like Priestley and Hartley did not shrink from supporting their materialistic theories by theological arguments. We have here the blending of a sensualistic epistemology, a mechanical-teleological metaphysics, a historical criticism, and an a prioristic ethics whose product in the shape of natural religion was destined first to undermine Christianity, then to compete with it, and finally to supplant it.

3. Charles Blount

These various tendencies could not show themselves fully under the ecclesiastical restraint of the Restoration, yet they appear clearly enough in the writings of Charles Blount (d. 1693), usually placed second to Herbert in the lists of Deists. Like his predecessor, Blount dwells on the conflict between rival religions, and finds a standard of adjustment in a fusion of Herbert's theory of universal characteristics with Hobbes's prescription by the State. Like Hobbes and Spinoza, he touches serious problems of Biblical criticism at this early date. Freedom from prejudice is his boast; he asserts the supernatural character of Christianity on the basis of its miracles, after he has already rendered them dubious by parallels with non-Christian miracles. His works were: Anima mundi (London, 1679), Great is Diana of the Ephesians (1680), and The Two First Books of Philostratus concerning the Life of Apollonius Tyaneus, published in English with notes (1680).

4. John Locke

The Revolution of 1688, the establishment of the freedom of the press in 1694, the political favor that was bestowed on the new tendencies in theology, in opposition to the stricter Anglicanism which was tainted with Stuart partizanship, were conditions favorable to the development of the seed that had already been planted. Parallel with the liberalization of orthodox dogma, there ran a more radical development with the attainment of a standard for the testing of the contents of revelation. Of surpassing importance in this direction was the influence and work of John Locke (d. 1704), who, in the field of theology, found his starting point, like most prominent thinkers of the age, in the conflict of systems, doctrines, and practices. Out of his reflections on the data of experience he developed a mechanical-teleological metaphysics and an empirical-utilitarian ethics, the latter agreeing, with the old idea of lex naturae in that ethical experience merely confirms the connection established by a teleological government of the universe between certain acts and their consequences. In spite of his supernaturalist tendencies, Locke nevertheless maintained, in his Letters on Toleration (1689-92), that only rational demonstration, and not compulsion or mere assertion, can establish the validity of revelation. In the Essay concerning Human Understanding (1690) he had investigated the conception of revelation from the epistemological standpoint, and laid down the criteria by which the true revelation is to be distinguished from other doctrines which claim such authority. Strict proof of the formal character of revelation must be adduced; the tradition which communicates it to us must be fully accredited by both external and internal evidence; and its content must be shown to correspond with rational metaphysics and ethics. Revelation is revelation; but, after it is once given, it may be shown a posteriori to be rational, i.e., capable of being deduced from the premises of our reason. Only where this is possible is there a presumption in favor of the purely mysterious parts of revelation. Where these criteria are disregarded the way is open to the excesses of sects and priesthoods by which religion, the differentia of reasoning man, has often made him appear less rational than the beasts. Locke advances therefore the remarkable conception of a revelation that reveals only the reasonable and the universally cognizable. The practical consequences of the thesis are deduced in his Reasonableness of Christianity as Delivered in the Scriptures(1695), which aims at the termination of religious strife through the recovery of the truths of primitive, rational Christianity. From the Gospels and the Acts, as distinguished from the Epistles, he elicits as the fundamental Christian truths the doctrine of the messiahship of Jesus and that of the kingdom of God. Inseparably connected with these are the recognition of Jesus as ruler of this kingdom, forgiveness of sins, and subjection to the moral law of the. kingdom. This law is identical with the ethical portion of the law of Moses, which in its turn corresponds to the lex naturae or rationis. The Gospel is but the divine summary and exposition of the law of nature, and it is the advantage of Christianity over pagan creeds and philosophies that it offers this law of nature intelligibly, with divine authority, and free from merely ceremonial sacerdotalism. To do this it requires the aid of a supernatural revelation, whose message is attainable through reason also, but only in an imperfect way.

5. Toland, Collins, and Others

Deducing the full consequences of Locke's theory, John Toland (d. 1722), in his Christianity not Mysterious (1696), maintained that the content of revelation must neither contradict nor transcend the dictates of reason. Revelation is not the basis of truth, but only a "means of information" by which man may arrive at knowledge, the sanction for which must be found in reason. Primitive Christianity knew nothing of mystery, whose sources are Judaic and Greek, and the original Christian use of the word mysterium conveyed no idea of that which transcended reason. The basis is thus laid for the critical study of early Christianity. Further problems of Biblical criticism and the distinction between the diverse parties in primitive Christianity are advanced in Toland's Amyntor (1699) and Nazarenus ; or Jewish, Gentile and illahometan Christianity (1718). In like manner, Anthony Collins (d. 1729), in his Discourse of Freethinking (1713), developed the consequences of Locke's propositions. Revelation depends for its sanction upon its agreement with reason, and what is contrary to reason is not revelation. Practical morality is independent of dogma, which, on the contrary, has been the cause of much evil in the history of the world. Christ and the Apostles, the prototypes of the freethinkers, never made use of supernatural authority, but confined themselves to simple, rational demonstration. Collins's work elicited numerous replies; but none really made answer to his main thesis. After remaining silent for eleven years, Collins renewed the contest with a contribution on prophecy and miracles. Setting out from Locke's proposition that revelation was truth sanctioned by reason, he found it a simple step to reject prophecy and miracles as non-essential characteristics of religion, amounting at most to mere didactic devices. The mathematician William Whiston (d. 1752) gave a new impulse to the controversy by the publication of The True Text (1722), in which the lack of real concordance between the New Testament interpretation of Old Testament prophecies is pointed out, and the prevailing allegorical method of reconciling such differences summarily rejected. The present form of the Old Testament is characterized as a forgery perpetrated by the Jews, and an attempt is made by Whiston to restore the original text. Collins, in his Discourse on the Grounds and Reasons of the Christian Religion (1724), agreed with Whiston as to the discrepancies between the two Testaments, but defended the allegorical method of interpretation. Thomas Woolston (d. 1733) came to the support of Collins in this controversy over the Biblical prophecies; and when his opponents shifted their appeal from the prophecies to the miraculous acts of Jesus he applied his destructive allegorical method to those also, in his Discourses on the Miracles of our Saviour (1727-30).

6. Matthew Tindal

Matthew Tindal (d. 1733), in his dialogue Christianity as Old as the Creation, or the Gospel a Republication of the Religion of Nature (1730), produced the standard text-book of Deism. Proceeding from Locke's proposition of the identity of the truths of revelation with those of reason, he adduces a new array of arguments in support of that position. The goodness of God, the vast extent of the earth, the long duration of human life on earth render it improbable that only to Jews and Christians was vouchsafed the favor of perceiving truth. We now have brought in the classic example of the three hundred million Chinese who surely could not all be excluded from the truth, and Confucianism begins to be extolled against much that is repugnant and harsh in the Mosaic law. Christianity, to be the truth, must find the substance in all religions; it must be as old as creation. The doctrines of the fall and of original sin can not stand, since it is irrational to believe in the exclusion from the truth of the vast majority of humanity. Tindal's position is orthodox to the extent that Judaism and Christianity are acknowledged as revelations, though revelations only of the lex naturae, which is identified with natural religion, the primitive, uncorrupted faith, consisting in "the practise of morality in obedience to the will of God." An echo of the teachings of Tindal is found in Thomas Chubb (d. 1747), whoseTrue Gospel of Jesus Christ (1738) attempts to prove that what Jesus sought to teach his followers was but natural morality, or the law of nature.

7. Morgan, Annet, and Middleton

Thomas Morgan (d. 1743) continued Tindal's argument on its historical side in The Moral Philosopher (1737-40),displaying much originality in tracing the development of heathen religions, as well as of Judaism and Christianity. Abandoning the old method of deriving specific religions from priestly deception, he explains their rise through the gradual supplanting of the one God of the law of nature by a crowd of divinities connected with definite natural phenomena. The legislation of Moses, under Egyptian influences, imposed a rigid and nationally restricted form upon the lex naturae, and the Jewish ritual and ceremonial is in essence a purely political institution. Full revelation of the law of nature came with Christ, who gave to the world in concentrated form the truth that had already been revealed to Confucius, Zoroaster, Socrates, and Plato. The protagonist of this divinely revealed truth after Christ was Paul, who, in his form of expression, indeed, was compelled to make concessions to the influence of Judaism, and in whom, therefore, much is to be taken figuratively. Peter, on the other hand, and the author of the Apocalypse misunderstood the import of the revelation of Christ and corrupted it in the spirit of Messianic Judaism. Persecution forced the two tendencies into union in the Catholic Church, and the Reformation has only partially succeeded in separating them. Morgan's argument results, therefore, in the rejection of the formerly assumed identity between the law of Moses and the lex naturm, and the restriction of the latter, in the fullness of revelation, to Christianity. His conclusions were denied by William Warburton in The Divine Legation of Moses (1738-41). When the Christian apologists substituted for the argument from miracles the argument from personal witness and the credibility of Biblical evidence, Peter Annet (d. 1769), in his Resurrection of Jesus (1744), assailed the validity of such evidence, and first advanced the hypothesis of the illusory. death of Jesus, suggesting also that possibly Paul should be regarded as the founder of a new religion. In Supernaturals Examined (1747) Annet roundly denies the possibility of miracles. Conyers Middleton (d. 1750) in his later writings sought to bridge over the gulf between sacred and profane history, and to test them equally by the same method. His Inquiry into the Miraculous Powers (1748) demonstrates that the belief in miracles is common to primitive Christianity and heathen creeds, and that it developed to great proportions in the later life of the Church,, so that one is then confronted with an endless succession of miracle to which belongs the same degree of credibility that the apologists attributed to the miracles of the Bible. Though special reference to the New Testament was omitted, Middleton propounded a question to answer which no serious attempt was mad when he asked why credence should be granted to one faith that is denied to another.

8. Shaftesbury, Mandeville, Dodwell, Bolingbroke

The Deistic controversy died out in England about the middle of the eighteenth century. The Deistic literature had exhausted its stock of materials, while its tenets had never obtained a strong hold on the people. The cold, inflexible, rational supernaturalism of Paley (d. 1805) was considered as the final settlement of these long conflicts. From the beginning, however, there had been a class of critics, representatives of the old Renaissance spirit, and inimical, therefore, to the Stoic and Christian ethics, who had only partially shared the views of the Deists, and in some ways had advanced to a position far beyond them. Shaftesbury (d. 1713), in opposition to the utilitarian and supernaturalist ethics of Locke and Clarke, developed the conception of a strictly autonomous moral code having its basis in a moral instinct in man whose end is to bring individual and society to harmonious self-perfection. Bernard Mandeville (1733) adopted the Epicureanism of Hobbes and Gassendi, studied moral problems in the skeptical spirit of Montaigne and La Rochefoucauld, gave the preference to Bayle over the Deists, and developed empiricism into a sort of Agnosticism. He criticized the prevailing morality as a more conventional lie. Christianity-which the Deists had wished, while reforming, to maintain-he declared impossible, not only as a religion, but as a system of morality. His Free Thought on Religion (1720) has caused him to be included in the ranks of the Deists; but his real position is brought out in the Fable of the Bees (1714). Henry Dodwell (d. 1711), in Christianity not Founded on Argument(1742), attempted to demonstrate the invalidity of the rationalistic basis for Christian truth constructed by the Deists, from the very nature of the religious impulse, which, being opposed to rational argumentation, calls for the support of tradition and mystery, and finds fascination in the attitude of credo quia absurdum. The only proof proceeds from a mystic inner enlightenment; logical demonstrations like those of Clarke or the Boyle lectures are only destructive of religion. Bolingbroke (d. 1751) voices the French influence in a capricious and dilettante manner. Despising all religions as the product of enthusiasm, fraud, and superstition, he nevertheless concedes to real Christianity the possession of moral and rational truth; an advocate of freedom of thought, he supports an established church in the interest of the State and of public morals (Letters on the Study and Use of History 1752; Essays, 1753).

9. Hume's Influence

Far greater is the influence of David Hume (d. 1776), who summarized the Deistic criticism and raised it to the level of modern scientific method by emancipating it from the conception of a deity conceived through the reason and by abandoning its characteristic interpretation of history. He separates Locke's theory of knowledge from its connection with a scheme of mechanical teleology and confines the human mind within the realm of sense perception. Beginning then with the crudest factors of experience and not with a religious and ethical norm, he traces the development of systems of religion, ethics, and philosophy in an ascending course through the ages. He thus overthrow the Deistic philosophy of religion while he developed their critical method to the extent of making it the starting-point for the English positivist philosophy of religion. Distinguishing between the metaphysical problem of the idea of God and the historical problem of the rise of religions, he denied the possibility of attaining a knowledge of deity through the reason, and explained religion as arising from the misconception or arbitrary misinterpretation of experience (Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion, written in 1751, but not published till 1779; Natural History of Religion, 1757). Against the justification of religion by other means than rational Hume directs his celebrated critique of miracles, in which to the possibility of miraculous occurrences he opposes the possibility of error on the part of the observer or historian. Human experience, affected by ignorance, fancy, and the imaginings of fear and hope, explains sufficiently the growth of religion. Hume's contemporaries failed to recognize the portentous transformation which he had effected in the character of Deism. The Scottish "common-sense school " saved for a time the old natural theology and the theological argument from miracles to revelation; but in reality Hume's skeptical method, continued by Hamilton and united to French Positivism by Mill and Browne, became, in connection with modern ethnology and anthropology, the basis of a psychological philosophy of religion in which the data of outward experience are the main factors (Evolutionism, Positivism, Agnosticism, Tylor, Spencer, Lubbock, Andrew Lang). In so far as Hume's influence prevailed among his contemporaries, it may be said to have amalgamated with that of Voltaire; the "infidels," as they were now called, were Voltairians. Most prominent among them was Gibbon (d. 1794), whose Decline and Fall offers the first dignified pragmatic treatment of the rise of Christianity. The fundamental principles of Deism became tinged in the nineteenth century with skepticism, pessimism, or pantheism, but the conceptions of natural religion retained largely their old character.

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French Deism

With other English influences Deism entered France, where, however, only its materialistic and revolutionary phases were seized upon, to the exclusion of that religiosity which had never been lost in England. French Deism stood outside of theology. The English writers who came to exercise the greatest influence were Hobbes, Locke, Shaftesbury, Pope, Bolingbroke, and Hume. Of the true Deists only Collins, the most critical and the least theological, became prominent.

Table of Contents

  1. Voltaire
  2. Encyclopedists
  3. Rousseau

1. Voltaire

Voltaire (d. 1778) embraced the conception of natural religion with ardor, and entered into a polemics against intolerance in Church and State relations as well as against the philosophy of the Church and the prevailing religious Cartesianism (Essai sur les mmurs et l'esprit des nations, 1754-58; Dictionnaire philosophique, 1764). He derived his natural philosophy from Newton and Clarke, his theory of knowledge and his ideas on toleration from Locke, the main principles of his ethics from Shaftesbury, his critical method and the conception of natural religion from the Deists. All phenomena are explained historically by the interaction between man and his environment, and all things are governed by God acting only in accordance with natural laws. Natural morality and religion are not entirely innate ideas, but rather simple and universally prevalent conditions standing in need of development and following a course that leads through errors arising from ignorance and fear to an ultimate standard truth which is characterized as the "fruit of the cultivated reason." Deism is thereby emptied of all religious content and restricted to the field of morals and rational metaphysics.

All that is essentially characteristic of human nature is the same everywhere; all that depends on custom varies. The chief influences for changes in the human mind are climate, government, religion, and in opposition to these one should seek to arrive at the underlying, undiversified unity. "Dogma leads to fanaticism and strife; morality everywhere inspires harmony." The rise of positive religions may be studied psychologically in children and savages. Fear and ignorance of the law of nature are the primary causes; the parallel growth of social groups and the need of authority cooperate. In China alone natural religion has escaped this pernicious development. India be came the home of theological speculation, and influenced the religions of the West, of which the most important was Judaism as the parent of Christianity and Islam. Moses was a shrewd politician; the prophets were enthusiasts like the dervishes, or else epileptics; Jesus was a visionary like the founder of the Quakers, and his religion received life only through its union with Platonism. Voltaire's conception of the evolution of history entered deep into European thought. By the side of the party of the juste milieu and of good sense," of which Voltaire is the most prominent representative, there arose a school which carried the doctrines of mechanism and sensualism to their furthest consequences. and evolved a philosophy of materialism.

2. Encyclopedists

The Encyclopedists removed from Deism the great factor of natural religion, retaining only its critical method as applied to the history of religion. The head of this school was Denis Diderot (d. 1784), and its great organ of expression was theEncyclopedie. The state censorship, however, compelled the projectors to call to their aid a number of contributors of conservative views and to bring their skeptical method to the task of defending the compromise between reason and revelation. In this spirit the main religious topics were treated, but by a subtle infusion of the spirit of Bayle and the expedient of cross-references from these articles to topics which might be handled with greater freedom, Diderot succeeded in supplying the desired corrective. It was the circle of Holbach (d. 1789) that dared to apply the most extreme consequences of materialism to religious questions. Helvetius (d. 1771) prepared the way with his De l'esprit (17,58), in which he expounded a materialistic psychology and ethics. Their moral theories, deriving though they did from Hobbes and Hume, lost all connection with the position of Deism, which became for them a mere armory of weapons for the destruction of all religion with its consequences, intolerance and moral corruption. Holbach is undoubtedly the author of the Systeme de la nature, which appeared in 1770 as the work of Mirabaud. The Systeme is not original in ascribing the beginnings of religion to human hope and fear and to ignorance of the laws of nature. Fraud, ambition, and unhealthy enthusiasm have made use of it as a means of political and social influence and have succeeded in crystallizing its primitive emotions into positive creeds, within which animistic tendencies have been developed and subtilized into systems of metaphysics and theology -- the sources of irrational intolerance. From Holbach and his circle, and from the cognate group of the Encyclopedists, proceeded the so-called ideological school, who held the main problem of philosophy to be the analysis of the mental conceptions aroused by sensations from the material world (Condorcet, Naigeon, Garat, Volney, Dupuis, Saint-Lambert, Laplace, Cabinis, De Tracy, J. B. Say, Benjamin Constant, Bichat, Lamarck, Saint-Simon, Thurot, Stendhal). Out of this school, in turn, developed the positivism of Comte.

3. Rousseau

J. J. Rousseau (d. 1778) gave quite a different tendency to Deism. Accepting in the main the sensualism of Locke and the metaphysics of Clarke and Newton, he maintains after the manner of Shaftesbury and Diderot a belief in inborn moral instincts which he distinguishes as " sentiments " from mere acquired ideas; he is true to the position of Deism in connecting this moral "sentiment " with a belief in God, and he protests against the separation between the two which the skepticism of Diderot had brought about. He was influenced by Richardson, as well as by Locke. "Sentiment " becomes the basis of a metaphysical system built up out of the data of experience under the influence of the Deistic philosophy, but redeemed from formalism by constant reference to sentimentality and emotion as the principal sources of religion. The nature of religion is not dogmatic but moralistic, practical, and emotional. Rousseau, therefore, finds the essence of religion, not (like Voltaire) in the cultivated intellect, but in the naive and disinterested understanding of the uncultured. Conscious, rational progress in civilization, no less than supernaturalism in Church and State, is an outcome of the fall, when the will chose intellectual progress in preference to simple felicity. With Rousseau natural religion takes on a new meaning; "nature" is no longer universality or rationality in the cosmic order, in contrast to special supernatural and positive phenomena, but primitive simplicity and sincerity, in contrast to artificiality and studied reflection. In his scheme of the rise of religions he gets out from the common standpoint of the discrepancies and contradictions prevailing among historic creeds. Yet positive religion to him is not so much the product of ignorance and fear as the corruption of the original instinct through the selfishness of man, who has erected rigid creeds that he might arrogate to himself unwarranted privilege or escape the obligations of natural morality., Something of the true religion is to be found in every faith, and of all creeds Christianity has retained the greatest measure of the original truth, and the purest morality. So sublime and yet so simple does Rousseau find the Gospel that he can scarcely believe it the work of men. Its irrational elements he attributes to misconception on the part of the followers of Jesus and especially of Paul, who had no personal communication with him. It was natural that between the advocate of such views and the party of the materialists strife should rise, and in fact Rousseau's religious influence in France was slight. On the rising German idealism, however, he exercised a great influence.

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Roman Philosophy

roman_philosophyRoman philosophy is thoroughly grounded in the traditions of Greek philosophy. Interest in the subject was first excited at Rome in 155 BCE. by an Athenian embassy, consisting of the Academic Carneades, the Stoic Diogenes, and the Peripatetic Critolaus. Of more permanent influence was the work of the Stoic Panaetius, the friend of the younger Scipio and of Laelius; but a thorough study of Greek philosophy was first introduced in the time of Cicero and Varro. In a number of works they tried to make it accessible even to those of their countrymen who were outside the learned circles. Cicero chiefly took it up in a spirit of eclecticism ; but among his contemporaries Epicureanism is represented in the poetical treatise of Lucretius on the nature of things, and Pythagoreanism by Nigidium Figulus. In Imperial times Epicureanism and Stoicism were most popular, especially the latter, as represented by the writings of Seneca, Cornutus, and the emperor Marcus Aurelius; while Eclectic Platonism was taken up by Apuleius of Madaura. One of the latest philosophical writers of antiquity is Boethius, whose writings were the chief source of information as to Greek philosophy during the first centuries of the Middle Ages.

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Parmenides (b. 510 B.C.E.)

Parmenides-imgParmenides was a Greek philosopher and poet, born of an illustrious family about B.C.E. 510, at Elea in Lower Italy, and is is the chief representative of the Eleatic philosophy. He was held in high esteem by his fellow-citizens for his excellent legislation, to which they ascribed the prosperity and wealth of the town. He was also admired for his exemplary life. A "Parmenidean life" was proverbial among the Greeks. He is commonly represented as a disciple of Xenophanes. Parmenides wrote after Heraclitus, and in conscious opposition to him, given the evident allusion to Hericlitus: "for whom it is and is not, the same and not the same, and all things travel in opposite directions" (fr. 6, 8). Little more is known of his biography than that he stopped at Athens on a journey in his sixty-fifth year, and there became acquainted with the youthful Socrates. That must have been in the middle of the fifth century BCE., or shortly after it.

Parmenides broke with the older Ionic prose tradition by writing in hexameter verse. His didactic poem, called On Nature, survives in fragments, although the Proem (or introductory discourse) of the work has been preserved. Parmenides was a young man when he wrote it, for the goddess who reveals the truth to him addresses him as "youth." The work is considered inartistic. Its Hesiodic style was appropriate for the cosmogony he describes in the second part, but is unsuited to the arid dialectic of the first. Parmenides was no born poet, and we must ask what led him to take this new departure. The example of Xenophanes' poetic writings is not a complete explanation; for the poetry of Parmenides is as unlike that of Xenophanes as it well can be, and his style is more like Hesiod and the Orphics. In the Proem Parmenides describes his ascent to the home of the goddess who is supposed to speak the remainder of the verses; this is a reflexion of the conventional ascents into heaven which were almost as common as descents into hell in the apocalyptic literature of those days.

The Proem opens with Parmenides representing himself as borne on a chariot and attended by the Sunmaidens who have quitted the Halls of Night to guide him on his journey. They pass along the highway till they come to the Gate of Night and Day, which is locked and barred. The key is in the keeping of Dike (Right), the Avenger, who is persuaded to unlock it by the Sunmaidens. They pass in through the gate and are now, of course, in the realms of Day. The goal of the journey is the palace of a goddess who welcomes Parmenides and instructs him in the two ways, that of Truth and the deceptive way of Belief, in which is no truth at all. All this is described without inspiration and in a purely conventional manner, so it must be interpreted by the canons of the apocalyptic style. It is clearly meant to indicate that Parmenides had been converted, that he had passed from error (night) to truth (day), and the Two Ways must represent his former error and the truth which is now revealed to him.

There is reason to believe that the Way of Belief is an account of Pythagorean cosmology. In any case, it is surely impossible to regard it as anything else than a description of some error. The goddess says so in words that cannot be explained away. Further, this erroneous belief is not the ordinary man's view of the world, but an elaborate system, which seems to be a natural development the Ionian cosmology on certain lines, and there is no other system but the Pythagorean that fulfils this requirement. To this it has been objected that Parmenides would not have taken the trouble to expound in detail a system he had altogether rejected, but that is to mistake the character of the apocalyptic convention. It is not Parmenides, but the goddess, that expounds the system, and it is for this reason that the beliefs described are said to be those of 'mortals'. Now a description of the ascent of the soul would be quite incomplete without a picture of the region from which it had escaped. The goddess must reveal the two ways at the parting of which Parmenides stands, and bid him choose the better. The rise of mathematics in the Pythagorean school had revealed for the first time the power of thought. To the mathematician of all men it is the same thing that can be thought and that can be, and this is the principle from which Parmenides starts. It is impossible to think what is not, and it is impossible for what cannot be thought to be. The great question, Is it or is it not? is therefore equivalent to the question, Can it be thought or not?

In any case, the work thus has two divisions. The first discusses the truth, and the second the world of illusion -- that is, the world of the senses and the erroneous opinions of mankind founded upon them. In his opinion truth lies in the perception that existence is, and error in the idea that non-existence also can be. Nothing can have real existence but what is conceivable; therefore to be imagined and to be able to exist are the same thing, and there is no development. The essence of what is conceivable is incapable of development, imperishable, immutable, unbounded, and indivisible. What is various and mutable, all development, is a delusive phantom. Perception is thought directed to the pure essence of being; the phenomenal world is a delusion, and the opinions formed concerning it can only be improbable.

Parmenides goes on to consider in the light of this principle the consequences of saying that anything is. In the first place, it cannot have come into being. If it had, it must have arisen from nothing or from something. It cannot have arisen from nothing; for there is no nothing. It cannot have arisen from something; for here is nothing else than what is. Nor can anything else besides itself come into being; for there can be no empty space in which it could do so. Is it or is it not? If it is, then it is now, all at once. In this way Parmenides refutes all accounts of the origin of the world. Ex nihilo nihil fit.

Further, if it is, it simply is, and it cannot be more or less. There is, therefore, as much of it in one place as in another. (That makes rarefaction and condensation impossible.) it is continuous and indivisible; for there is nothing but itself which could prevent its parts being in contact with on another. It is therefore full, a continuous indivisible plenum. (That is directed against the Pythagorean theory of a discontinuous reality.) Further, it is immovable. If it moved, it must move into empty space, and empty space is nothing, and there is no nothing. Also it is finite and spherical; for it cannot be in one direction any more than in another, and the sphere is the only figure of which this can be said. What is is, therefore a finite, spherical, motionless, continuous plenum, and there is nothing beyond it. Coming into being and ceasing to be are mere 'names', and so is motion, and still more color and the like. They are not even thoughts; for a thought must be a thought of something that is, and none of these can be.

Such is the conclusion to which the view of the real as a single body inevitably leads, and there is no escape from it. The 'matter' of our physical text-books is just the real of Parmenides; and, unless we can find room for something else than matter, we are shut up into his account of reality. No subsequent system could afford to ignore this, but of course it was impossible to acquiesce permanently in a doctrine like that of Parmenides. It deprives the world we know of all claim to existence, and reduces it to something which is hardly even an illusion. If we are to give an intelligible account of the world, we must certainly introduce motion again somehow. That can never be taken for granted any more, as it was by the early cosmologists; we must attempt to explain it if we are to escape from the conclusions of Parmenides.

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Peripatetics

The Peripatetic doctrines were introduced into Rome along with other Greek philosophies by the embassy of Critolaus, Carneades, and Diogenes, but were little known until the tie of Sylla. Tyrannion the grammarian and Andronicus of Rhodes were the first who brought the writings of Aristotle and Theophrastus into notice. The obscurity of Aristotle's works hindered the success of his philosophy among the Romans. Julius Caesar and Augustus patronized the Peripatetic doctrines. Under Tiberius, Caligula, and Claudius, however, the Peripatetics along with other philosophical schools, were either banished or obliged to remain silent on their views. This was also the case during the greater part of the reign of Nero, although, in the early part of it philosophy was favored. Ammonius the Peripatetic made great efforts to extend the authority of Aristotle, but about this time the Platonists began to study his writings, and prepared the way for the Eclectic Peripatetics under Ammonius Sacas, who flourished about a century after Ammonius the Peripatetic. After the time of Justinian, philosophy in general declined. But in the writings of the scholastics, Aristotle's views predominated. About the 12th century it had many adherents among the Saracens and Jews, particularly in Spain.

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Prodicus (fl. 5th c. B.C.E.)

Prodicus was a sophist and rhetorician from Iulis on the island of Ceos. He was contemporary with Democritus and Gorgias, and was a disciple of Protagoras. He flourished in the 86th Olympiad, and it is reported that his disciples included Socrates, Euripides, Theramenes, and Isocrates. His countrymen, after giving him several public jobs, sent him as ambassador to Athens. He was so well received there that he was induced to open a school of rhetoric. In his lectures on literary style he laid stress on the right use of words and the accurate discrimination between synonyms. Plato frequently satirizes him as a pedantic lecturer on the niceties of language. Plato also insinuates that the prospect of wealth prompted Prodicus to open his school, and indeed his lectures seem to have brought him much money. Philostratus also notes that Prodicus was fond of money. He used to go from one city to another displaying his eloquence, and, though he did it in a mercenary way, he nevertheless had great honors paid to him in Thebes and Lacedaemon. His charge to a pupil was fifty drachmae. Aristophanes, however, describes him as the most remarkable of the natural philosophers for wisdom and character. It is reported that people flocked to hear Prodicus, although he had an unpleasant sounding voice. It also related that Xenophon, when a prisoner in Boeotia, desiring to hear Prodicus, came up with the required bail and went and gratified his curiosity (Philostr. l. c.). None of his lectures has come down to us in its original form. His most famous work is The Choice of Hercules, and was frequently cited. The original is lost, but the substance of it is in Xenophon's Memorabilia(2:1:21). Prodicus was put to death by the Athenians on the charge of corrupting their youth. Sextus Empiricus ranks him among the atheists, and Cicero remarks that some of his doctrines were subversive of all religion. It is said that he explained the origin of religion by the personification of natural objects.

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Pyrrho (c. 360—c. 270 B.C.E.)

PyrrhoPyrrho was a Greek philosopher from Elis, and founder of the Greek school of skepticism. In his youth he practiced the art of painting, but passed over this for philosophy. He studied the writings of Democritus, became a disciple of Bryson, the son of Stilpo, and later a disciple of Anaxarchus. He took part in the Indian expedition of Alexander the Great, and met with philosophers of the Indus region. Back in Greece he was frustrated with the assertions of the Dogmatists (those who claimed to possess knowledge), and founded a new school in which he taught fallibilism, namely that every object of human knowledge involves uncertainty. Thus, he argued, it is impossible ever to arrive at the knowledge of truth (Diog. Laert, 58). It is related that he acted on his own principles, and carried his skepticism to such an extreme, that his friends were obliged to accompany him wherever he went, so he might not be run over by carriages or fall down precipices. It is likely, though, that these reports were invented by the Dogmatists whom he opposed. He spent a great part of his life in solitude, and was undisturbed by fear, or joy, or grief. He withstood bodily pain, and when in danger showed no sign of apprehension. In disputes he was known for his subtlety. Epicurus, though no friend to skepticism, admired Pyrrho because he recommended and practiced the kind of self-control that fostered tranquillity; this, for Epicurus, was the end of all physical and moral science. Pyrrho was so highly valued by his countrymen that they honored him with the office of chief priest and, out of respect for him, passed a decree by which all philosophers were made immune from taxation. He was an admirer of poets, particularly Homer, and frequently cited passages from his poems. After his death, the Athenians honored his memory with a statue, and a monument to him was erected in his own country.

Pyrrho left no writings, and we owe our knowledge of his thoughts to his disciple Timon of Phlius. His philosophy, in common with all post-Aristotelian systems, is purely practical in its outlook. Skepticism is not posited on account of its speculative interest, but only because Pyrrho sees in it the road to happiness, and the escape from the calamities of life. The proper course of the sage, said Pyrrho, is to ask himself three questions. Firstly we must ask what things are and how they are constituted. Secondly, we ask how we are related to these things. Thirdly, we ask what ought to be our attitude towards them. As to what things are, we can only answer that we know nothing. We only know how things appear to us, but of their inner substance we are ignorant. The same thing appears differently to different people, and therefore it is impossible to know which opinion is right. The diversity of opinion among the wise, as well as among the vulgar, proves this. To every assertion the contradictory assertion can be opposed with equally good grounds, and whatever my opinion, the contrary opinion is believed by somebody else who is quite as clever and competent to judge as I am. Opinion we may have, but certainty and knowledge are impossible. Hence our attitude to things (the third question), ought to be complete suspense of judgment. We can be certain of nothing, not even of the most trivial assertions. Therefore we ought never to make any positive statements on any subject. And the Pyrrhonists were careful to import an element of doubt even into the most trifling assertions which they might make in the course of their daily life. They did not say, "it is so," but "it seems so," or "it appears so to me." Every observation would be prefixed with a "perhaps," or "it may be."

This absence of certainty applies as much to practical as to theoretical matters. Nothing is in itself true or false. It only appears so. In the same way, nothing is in itself good or evil. It is only opinion, custom, law, which makes it so. When the sage realizes this, he will cease to prefer one course of action to another, and the result will be apathy (ataraxia). All action is the result of preference, and preference is the belief that one thing is better than another. If I go to the north, it is because, for one reason or another, I believe that it is better than going to the south. Suppress this belief, learn that the one is not in reality better than the other, but only appears so, and one would go in no direction at all. Complete suppression of opinion would mean complete suppression of action, and it was at this that Pyrrho aimed. To have no opinions was the skeptical maxim, because in practice it meant apathy, total quietism. All action is founded on belief, and all belief is delusion, hence the absence of all activity is the ideal of the sage. In this apathy he will renounce all desires, for desire is the opinion that one thing is better than another. He will live in complete repose, in undisturbed tranquillity of soul, free from all delusions. Unhappiness is the result of not attaining what one desires, or of losing it when attained. The wise person, being free from desires, is free from unhappiness. He knows that, though people struggle and fight for what they desire, vainly supposing some things better than others, such activity is but a futile struggle about nothing, for all things are equally indifferent, and nothing matters. Between health and sickness, life and death, difference there is none. Yet insofar as we are compelled to act, we will follow probability, opinion, custom, and law, but without any belief in the essential validity or truth of these criteria.

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Pythagoras (c. 570—c. 495 B.C.E)

PythagorasThe pre-Socratic Greek philosopher Pythagoras must have been one of the world's greatest persons, but he wrote nothing, and it is hard to say how much of the doctrine we know as Pythagorean is due to the founder of the society and how much is later development. It is also hard to say how much of what we are told about the life of Pythagoras is trustworthy; for a mass of legend gathered around his name at an early date. Sometimes he is represented as a man of science, and sometimes as a preacher of mystic doctrines, and we might be tempted to regard one or other of those characters as alone historical. The truth is that there is no need to reject either of the traditional views. The union of mathematical genius and mysticism is common enough. Originally from Samos, Pythagoras founded at Kroton (in southern Italy) a society which was at once a religious community and a scientific school. Such a body was bound to excite jealousy and mistrust, and we hear of many struggles. Pythagoras himself had to flee from Kroton to Metapontion, where he died.

It is stated that he was a disciple of Anaximander, his astronomy was the natural development of Anaximander's. Also, the way in which the Pythagorean geometry developed also bears witness to its descent from that of Miletos. The great problem at this date was the duplication of the square, a problem which gave rise to the theorem of the square on the hypotenuse, commonly known still as the Pythagorean proposition (Euclid, I. 47). If we were right in assuming that Thales worked with the old 3:4:5 triangle, the connection is obvious.

Pythagoras argued that there are three kinds of men, just as there are three classes of strangers who come to the Olympic Games. The lowest consists of those who come to buy and sell, and next above them are those who come to compete. Best of all are those who simply come to look on. Men may be classified accordingly as lovers of wisdom, lovers of honor, and lovers of gain. That seems to imply the doctrine of the tripartite soul, which is also attributed to the early Pythagoreans on good authority, though it is common now to ascribe it to Plato. There are, however, clear references to it before his time, and it agrees much better with the general outlook of the Pythagoreans. The comparison of human life to a gathering like the Games was often repeated in later days. Pythagoras also taught the doctrine of Rebirth or transmigration, which we may have learned from the contemporary Orphics. Xenophanes made fun of him for pretending to recognize the voice of a departed friend in the howls of a beaten dog. Empedocles seems to be referring to him when he speaks of a man who could remember what happened ten or twenty generations before. It was on this that the doctrine of Recollection, which plays so great a part in Plato, was based. The things we perceive with the senses, Plato argues, remind us of things we knew when the soul was out of the body and could perceive reality directly.

There is more difficulty about the cosmology of Pythagoras. Hardly any school ever professed such reverence for its founder's authority as the Pythagoreans. 'The Master said so' was their watchword. On the other hand, few schools have shown so much capacity for progress and for adapting themselves to new conditions. Pythagoras started from the cosmical system of Anaximenes. Aristotle tells us that the Pythagoreans represented the world as inhaling 'air' form the boundless mass outside it, and this 'air' is identified with 'the unlimited'. When, however, we come to the process by which things are developed out of the 'unlimited', we observe a great change. We hear nothing more of 'separating out' or even of rarefaction and condensation. Instead of that we have the theory that what gives form to the Unlimited is the Limit. That is the great contribution of Pythagoras to philosophy, and we must try to understand it. Now the function of the Limit is usually illustrated from the arts of music and medicine, and we have seen how important these two arts were for Pythagoreans, so it is natural to infer that the key to its meaning is to be found in them.

It may be taken as certain that Pythagoras himself discovered the numerical ratios which determine the concordant intervals of the musical scale. Similar to musical intervals, in medicine there are opposites, such as the hot and the cold, the wet and the dry, and it is the business of the physician to produce a proper 'blend' of these in the human body. In a well-known passage of Plato's Phaedo (86 b) we are told by Simmias that the Pythagoreans held the body to be strung like an instrument to a certain pitch, hot and cold, wet and dry taking the place of high and low in music. Musical tuning and health are alike means arising from the application of Limit to the Unlimited. It was natural for Pythagoras to look for something of the same kind in the world at large. Briefly stated, the doctrine of Pythagoras was that all things are numbers. In certain fundamental cases, the early Pythagoreans represented numbers and explained their properties by means of dots arranged in certain 'figures' or patterns.

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Menippus

MenippusMenippus, an adherent of the Cynic School of philosophy, was a Greek philosopher of Gadara in Syria, who flourished about 250 BCE. He was born at Sinope in Asia Minor, but his family was originally from Gadara, in Palestine. According to Diogenes Laertius, he was at first a slave, but afterward obtained his freedom by purchase, and eventually succeeded, by dint of money, in obtaining citizenship at Thebes. Here he pursued the employment of a money lender, and obtained from this the title "one who lends money at daily interest". Having been defrauded, and having lost, in consequence, all his property, he hung himself in despair. Menippus was the author of several works, now completely lost; they satirized the follies of human kind, especially of philosophers, in a sarcastic tone Among other productions, he wrote a piece entitled "The Sale of Diogenes," and another called "Necromancy." They were a medley of prose and verse, and became models for the satirical works of Varro (hence called Saturae Menippeae. It is suggested that the Necromancy inspired an imitator of Lucian to compose the "Menippus, or Oracle of the Dead," which is found among the works of the native of Samosata.

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Leucippus (5th cn. B.C.E.)


Leucippus was the founder of Atomism. We know next to nothing about his life, and his book appears to have been incorporated in the collected works of Democritus. No writer subsequent to Theophrastos seems to have been able to distinguish his teaching from that of his more famous disciple. Indeed his very existence has been denied, though on wholly insufficient grounds.

Aristotle gives a clear and intelligible account of the way Leucippus' theory arose. It originated from Parmenides' denial of the void, from which the impossibility of multiplicity and motion had been deduced. Leucippus supposed himself to have discovered a theory which would avoid this consequence. He admitted that there could be no motion if there was no void, and he inferred that it was wrong to identify the void with the non-existent. Leucippus was the first philosopher to affirm, with a full consciousness of what he was doing, the existence of empty space. The Pythagorean void had been more or less identified with 'air', but the void of Leucippus was really a vacuum.

Besides space there was body, and to this Leucippus ascribed all the characteristics of Parmenides notion of the real. The assumption of empty space, however, made it possible to affirm that there was an infinite number of such reals, invisible because of their smallness, but each possessing all the marks of the Parmenidean One, and in particular each indivisible like it. These moved in the empty space, and their combinations can give rise to the things we perceive with the senses. Pluralism was at least stated in a logical and coherent way. Democritus compared the motions of the atoms of the soul to that of the particles in the sunbeam which dart hither and thither in all directions even when there is no wind, and we may fairly assume that he regarded the original motion of the other atoms in much the same way.

The atoms are not mathematically indivisible like the Pythagorean monads, but they are physically indivisible because there is no empty space in them. Theoretically, then, there is no reason why an atom should not be as large as a world. Such an atom would be much the same thing as the Sphere of Parmenides, were it not for the empty space outside it and the plurality of worlds. As a matter of fact, however, all atoms are invisible. That does not mean, of course, that they are all the same size; for there is room for an infinite variety of sizes below the limit of the minimum visible. Leucippus explained the phenomenon of weight from the size of the atoms and their combustions, but he did not regard weight itself as a primary property of bodies. Aristotle distinctly says that none of his predecessors had said anything of absolute weight and lightness, but only of relative weight and lightness, and Epicurus was the first to ascribe weight to atoms. Weight for the earlier atomists is only a secondary phenomenon arising, in a manner to be explained, from excess of magnitude. It will be observed that in this respect the early atomists were far more scientific than Epicurus and even than Aristotle. The conception of absolute weight has no place in science, and it is really one of the most striking illustrations of the true scientific instinct of the Greek philosophers that no one before Aristotle ever made use of it, and Plato expressly rejected it.

The first effect of the motion of the atoms is that the larger atoms are retarded, not because they are 'heavy', but because they are more exposed to impact than the smaller. In particular, atoms of an irregular shape become entangled with one another and form groups of atoms, which are still more exposed to impact and consequent retardation. The smallest and roundest atoms, on the other hand, preserve their original motions best, and these are the atoms of which fire is composed. In an infinite void in which an infinite number of atoms of countless shapes and sizes are constantly impinging upon one another in all directions, there will be an infinite number of places where a vortex motion is set up by their impact. when this happens, we have the beginning of a world. It is not correct to ascribe this to chance, as later writers do. It follows necessarily from the presuppositions of the system. The solitary fragment of Leucippus we possess is to the effect that 'Naught happens for nothing, but all things from a ground (logos) and of necessity'.

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Peter Lombard (1095-1160)

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. The Sentences
  3. Analysis of the Sentences

1. Life

Peter Lombard, a scholastic theologian of the twelfth century, was commonly known as "the Lombard" after his birthplace which actually was probably Novara. It is expected that he then moved to Lombardy approximately after his birth in 1105-1110 CE He died in Paris, France about 1160 (1164). Although his family was poor, he found powerful patrons such as St. Bernard, that enabled him to gain a higher education at Bologna, then at Reims in France, and finally in Paris. In Paris, Peter taught theology in the cathedral school of Notre Dame, and it was there he found the time to produce the works discussed later in this article. Their dates can be only approximately fixed. The most famous of them, the Libri quatuor sententiarum , was probably composed between 1147 and 1150, although it may be placed as late as 1155. Nothing is certainly known of his later life except that be became bishop of Paris in 1159. According to Walter of St. Victor, a hostile witness, Peter obtained the office by simony; the more usual story is that Philip, younger brother of Louis VII. and archdeacon of Paris, was elected but declined in favor of Peter, his teacher. The date of his death can not be determined with certainty. The ancient epitaph in the church of St. Marcel at Paris assigns it to 1164, but the figures seem to be a later addition. The demonstrable fact that Maurice of Sully was bishop before the end of 1160 seems conclusive against it, although it is possible that in that year he resigned his see and lived three or four years longer.

2. The Sentences

The historic importance of Peter Lombard rests on his Sentences and the position taken by them in medieval philosophy. The earlier dogmatic theologians, such as Isidore of Seville, Alcuin, and Paschasius Radbert, had attempted to establish the doctrine of the Church from Bible texts and quotations from the Fathers. In the eleventh century this method gave place to dialectical and speculative working over of the traditional dogmas. Peter Lombard came into the field at a time when the now methods and their dialectical artifices were still exposed to wide-spread objection, but when the thirst for knowledge was exceedingly keen. One text-book after another was being published, the majority of them either issuing from the school of Abelard, or in some degree inspired by him. Of these works the greatest influence was attained by that of Peter, which was, for the time, an admirable compendium of theological knowledge. It is written under the influence preeminently of Abelard, Hugo of St. Victor, and the Decretum of Gratian. Whether Peter had himself seen the early writers whom he cites is frequently uncertain. As to his contemporaries, whom he knew thoroughly, he shows the influence of Abelard in his whole method and in countless details, while preserving a critical attitude toward his most pronounced peculiarities. On the other hand, he follows Hugo very closely and often textually, though here also with a tendency to avoid the purely speculative elements. For his sacramental doctrine, Gratian is very useful, especially through the quotations adduced by him and his legal attitude toward these questions.

3. Analysis of the Sentences

The first book of the Sentences deals, principally from a cosmological standpoint, with the evidences for the existence of God. For the doctrine of the Trinity he appeals to the analogies used since Augustine. However, he denies that any real knowledge of the doctrine can be obtained from these analogies without positive revelation and faith, and emphasizing the fact that human speech cannot give a satisfactory account of the nature of God. Joachim of Flore asserted that Peter changed the Trinity into a quaternity, and the charge was investigated at the Lateran Council of 1215. The basis of this charge was the manner in which he distinguished the divine substance from the three persons. Lombard asserted, as a realist, the substantive reality of this common substance. Joachim accused him of adding this substance to the three persons, but Innocent III. and the council decided that he was perfectly orthodox. The relation between the prescience of God and events is conceived in such a way that neither that which happens is the actual ground of the foreknowledge nor the latter of the former, but each is to the other a causa sine qua non . Predestination is thus, as a divine election, the preparation of grace and the foreknowledge and preparation of the blessings of God, through which man is justified. There is no such thing as merit antecedent to grace, not even in the sense that man can merit not to be cast away. The omnipotence of God consists in this, that he does what he wills and suffers nothing. A distinction is made between the absolute uncaused will of God, which is always accomplished, and what may be called his will in a loose sense. To thesigna beneplaciti , the signs of the latter, including commands, prohibitions, counsels, operations, permissions, results do not always correspond-" for God commanded Abraham to sacrifice his son, yet did not will it to be done."

The second book of the Sentences deals with creation and the doctrine of the angels. Peter, following Hugo, considers the " image " and " likeness " of God as distinct, but does not decide for any of the three explanations of this distinction which he quotes. He rejects the traducianist theory of the origin of the human soul. He calls the will free, inasmuch as it " has power to desire and choose, without coercion or necessity, what it has decreed on grounds of reason," but he denies Abelard's theory that the moral character of an act depends on the will of the doer. Of some importance is the strong emphasis laid upon the actually sinful character of the nature derived from Adam, in conjunction with the condemnation of Abelard's proposition that " we inherit from Adam not guilt but penalty." In regard to grace he shows some independent thought, which had its influence on later teaching. Grace (gratia operans) is a power (virtus) which frees and heals the will, enabling it to perform good and meritorious works. Of grace and the will, grace is the more important. The third book deals with Christology, reproducing the traditional orthodox conceptions, but showing some influence from Abelard. One portion of this discussion brought him into suspicion of Nihilianism. He was accused by John of Cornwall and Walter of St. Victor, and more than one council took up the question without reaching a conclusion. The charge of Nestorianisn, which Gerhoh of Reichersberg brought against the Christology of his time, was made also against the Lombard. In regard to the atonement, he endeavored both to follow out the accepted system of his day and to make use of suggestions from Abelard. Christ merited glorification by his life, and by his death man's entrance into Paradise, his liberation from sin and its penalty and from the power of the devil. Christ as man is a perfect and sufficient sacrifice to achieve reconciliation, through the revelation of God's love made in his death; " the death of Christ then justifies us, when by it love is awakened in our hearts." Further, Christ sets man free from eternal punishment relaxando debitum; but to set man free from the temporal punishment, which is remitted in baptism and mitigated by penance, " the penances laid upon those who repent by the Church would not suffice unless the penalty borne by Christ were added to release us." There is a lack of clearness about this whole subject; the ideas of Abelard (Anselm is not noticed) show themselves now and again through all the effort to preserve the objective notion of the work of redemption.

The fourth book deals with the sacraments. Here Peter follows Hugo and the Decretum of Gratian; and his teaching was of great significance for the later development. He was probably the first to make a distinct classification of seven and only seven sacraments; he laid down the dogmatic questions to be discussed under the head of each, and he introduced matter from church law into his discussion of the sacramental dogma. In regard to the Eucharist, he speaks of the " conversion " of one substance into the other, without defining any further, and denies both the symbolic view and the consubstantiation taught by some followers of Berengar. In his doctrine of penance he follows Abelard in seeking theoretical justification for the change which by this time had taken place in the practice.

In spite of the cautious objectivity of the whole treatment, some of the propositions laid down in the Sentences were considered erroneous in after years. Walter of St. Victor asserts that at the Lateran council of 1179 it was proposed to condemn the Sentences but other matters prevented a discussion of the proposal. From the middle of the thirteenth century the University of Paris refused its assent to eight propositions, of a highly technical character, it is true, and Bonaventure declined to press them. Others were afterward added; but these objections did not interfere with the general popularity of the work, which had increased to such an extent by Roger Bacon's time (1267) that he could complain that lectures on it had forced those on Scriptural subjects into the background. Besides the " Sentences," other extant works of Peter Lombard are Commentarius in psalmos Davidicos and Collectanea in omnes D. Paitli epistolas both collections, in the manner of medieval Catenae, of quotations from patristic and early medieval theologians, with occasional independent remarks. A few unpublished manuscripts, some of them of doubtful authenticity, remain in various places. Of these the most important for a complete knowledge of the author are two manuscripts, one early thirteenth century, the other fourteenth, in the Bibliotheque Nationale at Paris, containing twenty-five festival sermons representing. a moderate type of medieval mystical theology, dominated by allegorical exegesis, but making some excellent practical points.

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Friedrich Heinrich Jacobi (1743-1819)

German philosopher; born at Dusseldorf January. 25,1743; died at Munich March. 10, 1819. He studied at Frankfort and Geneva, and in 1764 became the head of his father's business in Dusseldorf. After his appointment to the council for the duchies of Julich and Berg in 1772 he devoted himself entirely to literature and philosophy. His house at Pempelfort, near Dusseldorf, became the meeting-place of distinguished literary men. Among his more intimate friends were Wieland, Hamann, Herder, Lessing, and Goethe. On account of the political agitation of the time he went to Holstein in 1794. During the next ten years he resided chiefly at Wandsbeek, Hamburg, and Eutin. In 1804 he accepted a call to Munich in connection with the proposed Academy of Sciences there. He was president of the academy from its opening in 1807 till 1812. His writings are characterized by poetic fancy and religious sentiment rather than by logical necessity. He held that the understanding can only join and disjoin given facts, without explaining them, and that knowledge deduced in this way is conditioned and relatively unimportant, being always related to a background of existence which forever remains beyond abstract thinking. All demonstrable knowledge, therefore, is relative and conditioned; it does not touch the ultimate nature of things. The faculty by which we grasp ultimate facts is not the understanding, but faith, which Jacobi identified with reason. It was Jacobi who first pointed out the fatal contradiction involved in Kant's application of the category of causality to the Ding an Sich. His doctrine of the relativity of knowledge was later exploited by Sir William Hamilton. Jacobi's principal works are the two philosophical novels, Woldmwr (2 vols., Flensburg, 1779) and Eduard Allwills Briefsamlung (Breslau, 1781); Ueber die Lehre der Spinoza (1785; enlarged ed., 1789); Dazid Hunw fiber den Glauben, oder Ide-alis;nus und Realismus (1787), containing his criticism of Kant; Ueber das Unternehmen des Kritizismus, die Vernunft zu Verstande zu bringen (Hamburg, 1801); and Von den gottlichen Dingen und ihrer Offenbarung (Leipsic, 1811), which was directed against Schelling. During his last years Jacobi was employed in collecting and editing his Werke (6 vols., Leipsic, 1812-24). His Auserlesener Briefwechsel was edited by F. Roth (2 vols., 1825-27).

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Immanuel Hermann Fichte (1797—1879)

Fichte_I_HGerman philosopher, son of Johann Gottlieb Fichte b. at Jena July 18, 1797- d. at Stuttgart Aug. 8, 1879. He was for many years a gymnasial professor at Saarbrucken and Dusseldorf, and then professor of philosophy at Bonn 1836-42 (ordinary professor after 1840), and at Tubingen 1842-63. In 1863 he retired from the university and soon afterward settled in Stuttgart. He edited his father's works, founded and edited the Zeitschrift fur Philosophie und spekulative Theologie, and was a prolfic writer on philosophy. In metaphysics his position was that of a mediator between the two conflicting views represented by Hegel and Herbart, and, too, in the interest of theology. His great aim was to secure a philosophical basis for the personality of God. Taking the monadology of Leibniz as the model of a system embracing unity in plurality and plurality in unity, he sought to fuse extreme spiritualistic monism and extreme pluralistic realism into what he called concrete theism. The more important of his independent works are, Beitrdge zur Charakteristik der rteuern Philosophie (Sulzbach, 1829; 2d ed., completely rewritten, 1841); Religion und Philosophie (Heidelberg, 1834); Die speculative Theologie (3 parts, 1846); System der Ethik (2 vols., Leipsic, 1850-53); Anthropologie (18-56); Vermischte Schriften (2 vols., 1869); Die theistische Weltansicht und ihre Berechtigung (1873); and Der neuere Spiritualismus (1878).

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William Hamilton (1788—1856)

hamilton-william

Table of Contents

Life and Writings

Scottish philosopher, born at Glasgow March 8, 1788, died at Edinburgh May 6, 1856. He studied first in Glasgow University, where his father had been professor of anatomy and botany; took a course in medicine at the University of Edinburgh in 1806-07; and in May, 1807, entered Balliol College, Oxford (B.A., 1811; M.A., 1814), where he concentrated upon classics and philosophy and gained the reputation of being the most learned Aristotelian in the university. In 1813 he settled in Edinburgh as an advocate, though he never secured a large practice. In 1820 he established his claim to the baronetcy of Preston, and was thenceforth known as Sir William. In the same year he was defeated for the chair of moral philosophy at the University of Edinburgh by John Wilson (Christopher North), but was elected to the professorship of civil history in 1821. About 1826 he took up the study of phrenology, and in 1826 and 1827 he read before the Royal Society of Edinburgh several papers antagonistic to the alleged science. He made his reputation as a philosopher by a series of articles that began to appear in the Edinburgh Review in 1829. In 1836 he was elected to the chair of logic and metaphysics in the University of Edinburgh, and held the position till his death. In 1843 he contributed to the lively ecclesiastical controversy of the time by publishing a pamphlet against the principle of non-intrusion. He was answered by William Cunningham. In July, 1844, he suffered a stroke of paralysis, which made him practically an invalid for the rest of his life.

Hamilton's principal works are: Discussions on Philosophy and Literature, Education and University Reform (London, 1852), containing his articles published in the Edinburgh ReviewNotes and Dissertations, published with his edition of T. Reid's Works (2 vols., Edinburgh, 1846-63); and his Lectures on Metaphysics and Logic (ed. H. L. Mansel and J. Veitch, 4 vols., 1859-60), of which an abridgment of the metaphysical portion (vols. i. and ii.) was edited by F. Bowen (Boston, 1870).

Philosophy Views

Hamilton was an exponent of the Scottish common-sense philosophy and a conspicuous defender and expounder of Thomas Reid, though under the influence of Kant he went beyond the traditions of the common-sense school, combining with a naive realism a theory of the relativity of knowledge. His psychology, while marking an advance on the work of Reid and Stewart, was of the " faculty " variety and has now been largely superseded by other views. His contribution to logic was the now well-known theory of the quantification of the predicate, by which he became the forerunner of the present algebraic school of logicians.

It is his law of the conditioned, with his correlative philosophy of the unconditioned, which comes into nearest relation with theology. This law is " that all that is conceivable in thought lies between two extremes, which, as contradictory of each other, can not both be true, but of which, as mutually contradictory, one must be true. . . . The law of the mind, that the conceivable is in every relation bounded by the inconceivable, I call the law of the conditioned." This involved his position that the Infinite is "incognizable and inconceivable." This doctrine on its philosophic side is a protest against Kant's skeptical result affirming that reason lands in hopeless contradictions; on its theological side it proclaims the impossibility of knowing the Absolute Being. Only by taking first the philosophic aspect can we correctly interpret its theological relations. Kant had made a priori elements only forms of the mind; and accordingly, the ideas of self, the universe, and God, became only regulative of our intellectual procedure, and in no sense guaranties of truth. Accordingly, Kant has dwelt on " the self-contradiction of seemingly dogmatical cognitions (the cum antithesi) in none of which we can discover any decided superiority." These were, that the world had a beginning, that it had not; that every composite substance consists of simple parts, that no composite thing does consist of simple parts; that causality according to the laws of nature is not the only causality operating to originate the world, that there is no other causality; that there is an absolutely necessary being, that there is not any such being. Hamilton's object was to maintain that such contradictions are not the product of reason, but of an attempt to press reason beyond its proper limits. If, then, we allow that the conceivable is only of the relative and bounded, we recognize at once that the so-called antinomies of reason are the result of attempts to push reason beyond its own province, to make our conceptions the measure of existence, attempting to bring the incomprehensible within the limits of comprehension.

Thus far a real service was rendered by Hamilton in criticizing the skeptical side of Kant's Critique of Pure Reason. He estimated this result so highly as to say of it, " if I have done anything meritorious in philosophy, it is in the attempt to explain the phenomena of these contradictions." At this point Hamilton ranks Reid superior to Kant; the former ending in certainty, the latter in uncertainty. But there remain for Hamilton's philosophy the questions: If we escape contradiction by refusing to attempt to draw the inconceivable within the limits of conception, what is the source of certainty as to the infinite? How are knowledge and thought related to the existence and attributes of the Infinite Being? Here Hamilton is entangled in the perplexity of affirming certainty which is yet unknowable. That there is an Absolute Being, source of all finite existence, is, according to him, a certainty; but that we can have any knowledge of the fact is by him denied. Reid had maintained the existence of the Supreme Being as a necessary truth; and Hamilton affirms that the divine existence is at least a natural inference; but he nevertheless holds that the Deity can not be known by us. This is with him an application of the law of the conditioned-a conclusion inevitable under admission that all knowledge implies the relative, the antithesis of subject and object. This doctrine of ignorance was developed by H. L. Mansel, and eagerly embraced by the experientialists, J. S. Mill and Herbert Spencer. This gave an impulse to Agnosticism, the influence of which must be largely credited to Kant, who reduced the a priori to a form of mental procedure, and to Hamilton, who rejected Kant's view, yet regarded the absolute as incognizable. However, while insisting that " the infinite God can not by us, in the present limitation of our faculties, be comprehended or conceived," Hamilton adds that "faith-belief is the organ by which we apprehend what is beyond our knowledge."

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Karl Robert Eduard Von Hartmann (1842—1906)

HartmannGerman philosopher, born at Berlin Feb. 23, 1842, died at the same place June 5, 1906. He was educated at the school of artillery in Berlin (1859-1862); and held a commission (1860-65), when he was compelled to retire on account of serious knee trouble. He took his degree at Rostock in 1867, returned to Berlin, and retired to Lichterfelde (5 m. s.w. of Berlin) in 1885, doing most of his work in bed while suffering great pain. After developing the thought for twenty-two years, he began in 1864 to prepare his main philosophical work, Philosophie des Unbewussten (Berlin, 1869; llth ed., 3 vols., 1904). Next in rank was his Das sittliche Bewusstsein, appearing first as Phenomenologie des sittlichen Bewusstseins (Berlin, 1879); and next to that was the Religionsphilosophie (2 vols., Das religiose Bewusstein der Menschheit and Die Religion des Geistes, 1882).

The object of his philosophy was to unite the "idea" of Hegel with the "will" of Schopenhauer in his doctrine of the Absolute Spirit, or, as he preferred to characterize it, spiritual monism. He held that " a will which does not will something is not." The world was produced by will and idea, but not as conscious; for consciousness, instead of being essential, is accidental to will and idea-the two poles of " the Unconscious." Matter is both idea and will. In organic existences, in instinct, in the human mind, on the field of history, the unconscious will acts as though it possessed consciousness, that is, as though it were aware of the ends and of the infallible means for their realization. Consciousness arises from the active will and the will's opposition to this condition. Because of the wisdom displayed in the action of the Unconscious, this is the best possible world; only this does not prove that the world is good, or that the world would not be better, the latter of which is true. Human life labors under three illusions: (1) that happiness is possible in this life, which came to an end with the Roman Empire; (2) that life will be crowned with happiness in another world, which science is rapidly dissipating; (3) that happy social well-being, although postponed, can at last be realized on earth, a dream which will also ultimately be dissolved. Man's only hope lies in "final redemption from the misery of volition and existence into the painlessness of non-being and non-willing." No mortal may quit the task of life, but each must do his part to hasten the time when in the major portion of the human race the activity of the Unconscious shall be ruled by intelligence, and this stage reached, in the simultaneous action of many persons volition will resolve upon its own non-continuance, and thus idea and will be once more reunited in the Absolute.

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Claude Adrien Helvetius (1715—1771)

helvetius

French philosopher; born in Paris January, 1715; died there Dec. 26, 1771. He studied at the College Louis-le Grand, and in 1738 received the lucrative post of farmer-general, which, however, he soon exchanged for the position of chamberlain to the queen. Tiring of the idle and dissipated life of the court, he married in 1751, and retired to a small estate at Vore, in Perche, where he devoted himself chiefly to philosophical studies. He visited England in 1764, and the following year he went to Germany, where he was received with distinction by Frederick II. He was one of the Encyclopedists, and held the skeptical and materialistic views common to that school of philosophy. His principal works are: De l'esprit (Paris, 1758; Eng. transl., De l'Esprit: or, Essays on the Mind, London, 1759), which, condemned by the Sorbonne and publicly burned at Paris, was translated into most European languages, and read more than any other book of the time; and the posthumous De l'homme, de ses facultes intellectuelles et de son Mucation (2 vols., London, 1772; Eng. transl., A Treatise on Man; his Intellectual Faculties and his Education, 2 vols.).

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Edward Herbert of Cherbury (1583—1648)

herbert

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Writings
  3. Truth
  4. Deism
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Life

Edward Herbert, was born at Eyton in Shropshire on March 3, 1583. He is the representative of a branch of the noble Welsh family of that name, and the elder brother of George Herbert the poet. He matriculated at University College, Oxford, in 1595, married in 1599, and continued to reside at Oxford till about 1600, when he removed to London. He was made a Knight of the Bath soon after the accession of King James. From 1608 to 1618 he spent most of his time on the continent as a soldier of fortune, occasionally seeking the company of scholars in the intervals of his campaigns, chases, or duels. In 1619 he was appointed ambassador at Paris; after his recall in 1624 King James rewarded him with an Irish peerage. He was created an English peer as Baron Herbert of Cherbury in 1629. The civil war found him unprepared for decision; but he ultimately saved his property by siding with the parliament. He died in London on 20 August 1648.

2. Writings

His works were historical, literary, and philosophical. His account of the Duke of Buckingham's expedition an his history of Henry VIII were written with a view to royal favor. The latter was published in 1649; a Latin version of the former appeared in 1658, the English original not till 1860. His literary works -- poems and autobiography -- are of higher merit. His poems were published by his son in 1665, and his autobiography was first printed by Horace Walpole in 1764. His philosophical works give him a distinct place in the history of thought. His greatest work, De Veritate, was, he tells us, begun in England and "formed there in all its principal parts.." Hugo Grotius, to whom he submitted the manuscript, advised its publication; but it was not till this advice had been sanctioned (as he thought) by a sign from heaven that he had the work printed (Paris, 1624). To the third edition (London, 1645) he added a short treatise De Causis Errorum, a dissertation entitled Religio Laici, and an Appendix ad Sacerdotes. In 1663 appeared his De Religione Gentilium -- a treatise on what is now called comparative religion. A popular account of his views on religion was published in 1768 under the title; although the external evidence is incomplete, it may have been from his pen.

3. Truth

Herbert does not stand in the front rank of speculative thinkers; but his claims as a philosopher are worthy of note. Like Francis Bacon he was occupied with the question of method; and his inquiry went deeper, though it was less effective upon philosophical opinion. Bacon investigated the criteria and canons of evidence, whereas Herbert sought to determine the nature and standard of truth. Descartes soon afterwards referred to the question and put it aside, saying of Herbert: "he examines what truth is; for myself, I have never doubted about it, as it seems to me to be a notion so transcendentally clear that it is impossible to ignore it" (letter of Oct. 16, 1639). The problem which Herbert put before himself concerned the conditions of knowledge; and it has bearing upon later thought, though it arises out of traditional views. In the end of the following century Kant said that his own new point of view was due to discarding the belief that "all our cognitions must conform to objects," which had been "hitherto assumed." This was, indeed the prevailing doctrine. Perception was held to be a "passio mentis" produced by the activity of the object which impressed its image (or, to use the term which Descartes and Locke made familiar, an idea) upon the mind. this view was rejected by Herbert as decidedly as by Kant, though he did not anticipate the Kantian revolution by assuming that "objects must conform to our cognition."

The distinction between mind and body had not yet been sharpened and turned into antagonism by the Cartesian dualism. Man is a complex of mind and body, and, according to Herbert, all that is passive in him is body (De Veritate, 3rd ed., p. 72). -- though body itself is not purely passive. Mind, however, is never passive. It acts but is not acted upon (ibid. p. 95). Things do not act upon it but are put within the sphere of its operation (ibid. p. 95). Nevertheless, it requires an occasion, or the presence of objects, to awaken its activity, even in its highest operations (ibid. p. 91). Herbert's expressions are not quite consistent, for this awakening of mental activity is itself an effect upon mind; but perhaps he might have defended his doctrine by appealing to the harmony which exists between faculty and object. For in this lies his fundamental conception -- different alike from the traditional view that cognition must conform to objects, and from the Kantian view that objects must conform to cognition. the mental faculty supplies a form analogous to the object as it exists (ibid. p. 97); the object, again,, neither undergoes an alteration of nature nor produces one, but only enters, as it were, into the faculty's range of view. The whole process is only intelligible on the supposition of a harmony between the world and the human mind. In this harmony the human body, fashioned out of the material of the external world and containing the sense-apparatus which lead to the "inner court" of consciousness, forms the bond of union.

Herbert's doctrine of the nature of truth rests on this conception of harmony. "Truth," he says, "is a certain harmony between objects and their analogous faculties" (ibid. p. 68). Four kinds or degrees of truth are distinguished by him: truth of the thing; truth of appearance; truth of concept; and truth of intellect. These seem to be arranged in an ascending scale. The first does not exclude the others; the last includes all the preceding, being the 'conformity' of the several 'conformities' they involve. The conditions of truth are also made to explain the possibility of error, for the causes of error lie in the intermediate stages between the thing and the intellect. The root of all error is in confusion -- in the inappropriate connection of faculty and object -- and it is for the intellect to expose the inappropriate connection and so to dissipate the error.

The doctrine arrived at is summed up in seven propositions (ibid. pp. 8-12); and all these hinge upon the postulate that mind corresponds with things not only in their general nature but in all their differences of kind, generic and specific. Every object is cognate to some mental power or faculty, and to every difference in the object there corresponds a different faculty. Herbert attempts no account of nature, and his psychology is only introduced in the interests of his doctrine of truth; but it is clear that there cannot be fewer faculties than there are differences of things. A faculty is defined as any internal force which unfolds a different mode of apprehension (sensus) to a different object (ibid. p. 30); and faculties are spoken of as radii animae, which perceive objects, or rather the image given out by objects, in accordance with mutual analogy. These images may be conveyed by the same sense-apparatus and yet be apprehended by different faculties, as is the case with figure and motion (ibid. p. 78). Hence countless faculties; but their very multiplicity suggests that Herbert cannot have attributed to them the same degree of independence as did the 'faculty-pschologists' of a recent generation. They may be said to be simply modes of mental operation; and mind operates differently as different kinds of objects are brought before it, showing always an aspect of its cognitive power analogous to the object.

Reflecting upon the various modes of mental activity, we may arrange these faculties into four classes: natural instinct, internal sense, external sense, and discourse or reasoning. These are not separate powers; and, although Herbert may have sometimes spoken of them as such, another doctrine may be found in his writings. According to this doctrine all mental faculty is regarded as informed in less or greater measure by the intellect, which is itself a manifestation in humans of the universal divine providence. "Our mind," he says, "is the highest image and type of the divinity, and hence whatever is true or good in us exists in supreme degree in God. Following out this opinion, we believe that the divine image has also communicated itself to the body. but, as in the propagation of light there is growing loss of distinctness as it gets farther from its source, so that divine image, which shines clearly in our living and free unity, first communicates itself to natural instinct or the common reason of its providence, then extends to the numberless internal and external faculties (analogous to particular objects), closes into shade and body, and sometimes seems as it were to retreat into matter itself" (ibid. p. 78).

The name 'natural instinct' is badly chosen; but it is not difficult to see what Herbert means by it. In particular, it is the home of those 'common notions' (as he calls them) which may be said to underlie all experience and to belong to the nature of intelligence itself. Some of these common notions are formed without any assistance from discourse or the ratiocinative faculty; others are only perfected by the aid of discourse. The former class is distinguished by certain tests or marks. Some of these tests are logical (such as independence, certainty, and necessity); others are psychological (such as priority in time and universality). but it is the last-named mark or "universal consent" that is made by him "the highest rule of natural instinct (ibid. p. 60), and "the highest criterion of truth" (ibid. p. 39).

This appeal to universal consent makes Herbert a precursor of the philosophy of Common Sense, and lays him open to the criticism urged by Locke that there are no truths which can satisfy the test, there being nothing so certain or so generally known that it has not been ignored or denied by some. Herbert made little if any use of the tests by which he might have shown that certain common notions are presupposed in the constitution of experience, and thus failed to carry out the theory of knowledge of which at times he had a clear view.

4. Deism

The common notions are practical as well as theoretical -- yield the first principles of morals as well as those of science. but he attempted no complete account of them and limited his investigation o the common notions of religion. To this portion of his work his direct influence as a thinker is chiefly due, for it determined the scope and character of the English Deistical movement. The common notions of religion are, he holds, the following: (1) that there is a supreme Deity; (2) that this Deity ought to be worshipped; (3) that virtue combined with piety is the chief part of divine worship; (4) that men should repent of their sins and turn from them; (5) that reward and punishment follow from the goodness and justice of God, both in this life and after it. These five articles contain the whole doctrine of the true catholic church, that is to say, of the religion of reason. They also formed the primitive religion before the people "gave ear to the covetous and crafty sacerdotal order." What is contrary to the 'five points' is contrary to reason and therefore false; what is beyond reason but not contrary to it may be revealed: but the record of a revelation is not itself revelation but tradition; and the truth of a tradition depends upon the narrator and can never be more than probable.

A separate work -- De Religione Gentilium -- was devoted to the verification of these results on the field of what is now called comparative religion. In respect of this work the claim may be justly made for Herbert that he was one of the first -- if not the first -- to make a systematic effort after a comparative study of religions. but he had no idea of the historical development of belief, and he looked upon all actual religions -- in so far as they went beyond his five articles -- as simply corruptions of the pure and primitive rational worship.

5. References and Further Reading

  • De Veritate, Prout distinguitur a Revelatione, a Verisimili, a Possibili, et a Falso (1633)
  • De Causis Errorum, De Religione Laici, Appendix ad Sacerdotes (1645)
  • Expeditio in ream Insulam (1656)
  • De Religione Gentilium Errorumque apud Eos Causis (1663)
  • A Dialogue between a Tutor and his Pupil (1768)
  • The Life of Edward Lord Herbert of Cherbury, Written by Himself (1764)

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Hippias (fl. 5th cn. B.C.E.)

A Greek sophist of Elis and a contemporary of Socrates. He taught in the towns of Greece, especially at Athens. He had the advantage of a prodigious memory, and was deeply versed in all the learning of his day. He attempted literature in every form which was then extant. He also made the first attempt in the composition of dialogues. In the two Platonic dialogues named after him (Hippias Major and Hippias Minor), he is represented as excessively vain and arrogant.

Hippias is chiefly memorable for his efforts in the direction of universality. He was the enemy of all specialization, and appeared at Olympia gorgeously attired in a costume entirely of his own making down to the ring on his finger. He was prepared to lecture to anyone on anything, from astronomy to ancient history. Such a man had need of a good memory, and we know that he invented a system of mnemonics. There was a more serious side to his character, however. This was the age when people were still optimistic of squaring the circle by a geometrical construction. The lunules of Hippocrates of Chios belong to it, and Hippias, the universal genius, could not be left behind here. He invented the curve still known as the quadratix, which would solve the problem if it could be mechanically described. Hippias appears to have originated the idea of natural law as the foundation of morality, distinguishing nature from the arbitrary conventions or fashions, differing according to the different times or regions in which they arise, imposed by arbitrary human enactment, and often unwillingly obeyed. He held that there is an element of right common to the laws of all countries and constituting their essential basis. He held also that the good and wise of all countries are naturally akin and should regard one another as citizens of a single state. This idea was subsequently developed by the Cynic and still more by the Stoic schools, passing from the latter to the jurists, in whose hands it became the great instrument for converting Roman law into a legislation for a people.

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Shadworth Hodgson (1832—1912)

Shadworth Hodgson's life was an example of rare devotion to philosophy. He had no profession and filled no public office, but spent his time in systematic reflection and writing; and his long life gave him the opportunity of reviewing, confirming, and improving upon his first thoughts. There were two periods in his activity. In the former of these he published three books: Time and Space in 1865, The Theory of Practice in 1870, and The Philosophy of Reflection in 1878. Shortly thereafter he was instrumental in founding 'the Aristotelian Society for the systematic study of philosophy,' and he remained its president for fourteen years. This led to contact with other minds who looked at the same subjects from different points of view. He read many papers to the society, which were published in pamphlet form and in its Proceedings, and he built up his own system afresh in the light of familiar criticism. It took final form in The Metaphysic of Experience, a work of four volumes published in 1898.

As an analysis of experience, Hodgson's philosophy falls into line with a characteristic English tradition. It agrees with this tradition also in taking the simple feeling as the ultimate datum of experience. But, even here, and wherever there is experience, there is a distinction to be drawn--not the traditional distinction between subject and object, but that between consciousness and its object. There are always two aspects in any bit of experience--that of the object itself or the objective aspect, and that of the awareness of it or the subjective aspect; and these two are connected by the relation of knowledge. The sciences are concerned with the objective aspect only; philosophy has to deal with the subjective aspect, or the conscious process which is fundamental and common to all the various objects. Beyond this conscious reference there is nothing. The mirage of absolute existence, wholly apart from knowledge, is a common-sense prejudice. Consciousness is commensurate with being; all existence has a subjective aspect. But this doctrine, he holds, is misinterpreted when mind and body are supposed to interact or when mental and bodily facts are regarded as parallel aspects of the same substance. In psychology Hodgson may be called a materialist, unfit as that name would be to describe his final philosophical attitude. Ideas do not determine one another, nor does desire cause volition; the only real condition known to us is matter. And yet matter itself is a composite existence; it can be analyzed into empirical precepts; and therefore it is itself conditioned by something which is not material: the very term existence implies relativity to some sort of consciousness or other. This is the conclusion of the general analysis of experience. Of the unseen world which lies beyond the material part of the world we cannot, he contends, have any speculative knowledge. But the ethical judgment and our own moral nature bring us into practical relation with that unseen world and thus permit a positive, although not a speculative, knowledge of it. In this way, in the final issue of his philosophy as well as in its fundamental positions, Hodgson regards himself as correcting and completing the work of Kant.

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Renaissance Humanism

The time when the term "Humanism" was first adopted is unknown. It is, however, certain that both Italy and the re-adopting of Latin letters as the staple of human culture were responsible for the name "Humanists." Literoe humaniores was an expression coined in reference to the classic literature of Rome and the imitation and reproduction of its literary forms in the "new learning"; this was in contrast to and against the Literoe sacroe of scholasticism. In the time of Ariosto, Erasmus, and Luther, the term umanisa was in effect an equivalent to the terms "classicist " or " classical scholar."

Table of Contents

  1. Italian Humanism
  2. Character of the Movement
  3. Erasmus

1. Italian Humanism

Dante had an admiration for ancient letters. At first, he intended to compose his great epic in Latin verse. Petrarch considered his Africa a fair effort to reproduce Vergil. In the exordium of his chief work Petrarc h appeals to the Heliconian Sisters as well as to Jesus Christ, Savior of the world. He also reviews the epics of Homer (although he never learned Greek), Statius, and Lucan. He was overwhelmed with the friendships of many prestigous men of his day, a mong whom Cardinal Stephen Colonna was prominent. Petrarch is the pathfinder as well as the measure of the new movement. He idealized the classical world. His classicist consciousness and his Christian consciousness are revealed in his writings. Th e experiences of life constantly evoke in him classic parallels, reminiscences, associations. Julius Caesar, Papirius Cursor, are nostri, "our people"; Pyrrhus, Hannibal, Massinissa are externi, "foreigners." His epistles provide the b est revelation of his soul. Of course, the craving for pure Latinity and the elevation of such practical power of imitation and reproduction involved an artificiality of which neither Petrarch nor his successors were aware. Boccaccio was not only a hu manist, but he, with appalling directness, revealed the emancipation of the flesh as one of the unmistakable trends of the new movement. Both he and Poggio, Valla, Beccadelli, Enea Silvio dei Piccolomini (in his youth) show that the hatred of the cle rical class instigated literary composition. At the same time in the caricatures of foulness which these leaders of the new learning loved to draw, there is no moral indignation, but clearly like satyrs they themselves relish these things. For this reason the Humanists of Italy, as such, were not at all concerned in the efforts for a reformation of the church as attempted in the councils of Constance or of Basel. Poggio, apostolic secretary, came to Constance with the pope, but spent most of his time in ransacking the libraries of Swiss monasteries for Latin codices. The defense of Jerome of Prague before the Council reminded him of Cato of Utica. His correspondent Lionardo Bruni at Florence warns him to be more circumspect in his praise of a heretic. In the Curia itself a semipagan spirit was bred by the Humanists. In 1447 Parentucelli, an enthusiast for codices, became pope as Nicholas V. On Easter, the eminent humanist Filelfo wrote to him from Milan to congratul ate him on his elevation. Filelfo expressed a general satisfaction of scholars, citing also the humanitas of Christ himself, as well as writing somewhat hypocritically of fucata gentilium . . . sapientia. Some time later, in 1453, Filelfo personally appeared at the papal court. Nicholas kept the vile "Satyrae" of the humanist until he had perused them, and gave Filelfo a purse of 500 ducats when he departed. Enea Silvio de' Piccolomini ascended the papal throne in 1458 as Pius II., another humanist pope.

2. Character of the Movement

A very clear view of the Humanistic movement may be gained from the writings of the biographer and beneficiary of Leo X., Paul Giovio (Jovius). In his Elogia (Antwerp,1557) he presents a gallery of literary scholar s, beginning with Dante, and including Petrarch, Boccaccio, Bruni, Poggo, Beceadelli (the pornographic poet), Valla, Filelfo, Platina, the Greeks Emanuel Chrysoloras, Cardinal Bessarion, Trapezuntius the Cretan, Theodorus Gaza, Argyropulos, Chalcondyla s, Musurus of Crete, and Lasearis. Also, he gives us Lorenzo de'Medici, Ermolao Barbaro, Politian, Pico di Mirandola, and even Savonarola. But Savonarola's attacks on Pope Alexander VI., father of Cesare and Lucrezia, are treated as treason and felon y. The Platonic academy of Ficinus at Florence had certainly no power to regenerate the political and moral corruption of its patron Lorenzo. Bibienna, the favorite of Leo X., was witty at banquets; at Leo's court this cardinal produced his lascivio us comedy, "Colandra," because Terence was too grave. Even Thomas More and Reuchlin are included. Among the latter's academic friends were the anonymous composers of the satiric Epistoloe obscurorum virorum-the flail of the new learning swung ag ainst the old. The Italian Humanists were not concerned in the reformatory movements of the fifteenth century. They drifted into a palpable paganism or semipaganism, curiously illustrated in the verse, e.g., of Politian, especially his Greek verse, a nd of him even the lax Giovio writes: "he was a man of unseemly morals. "They all more or less emphasized "vera virtus" by which they meant "true excellence," the self-wrought development of human faculties and powers. Still they knew how to ma intain friendly relations with those higher clerics who had resources with which to patronize the new learning. They often accepted clerical preferment, as did Gievio, who became bishop of Nocera. Often the Latin verse of their youth proved very awkw ard when they entered upon their benefices. All were more interested "in viewing the early monuments of sensual enjoyment" than in study of the New Testament. As they greatly exceeded the corruption of the clergy in their own conduct, they could not take any practical interest in any spiritual or theological reformation. In all the correspondence of Filelfo, extending from 1428 to 1462, there is but once or twice a slight (deistic) utterance of spiritual concern, when, in the siege of Milan by Francesco Sforza, 1449, the ducal city endured terrible sufferings. Jacob Burckhardt says of the Humanists that they were demoralized by their reproduction of Latin verse. But why did they delve in Ovid, Catullus, and the like with steady predilection? At best a mild deism or pantheism may be perceived in their more serious writings. Greek, on the whole, was a rare attainment among them, reproductive ostentation limited most of them to Latin.

3. Erasmus

Erasmus of Rotterdam in his person and career marks the point where the "new learning" had arrived at the parting of the ways. He felt an affinity for Lucian; his Encomium Morioe, a vitriolic satire, dealt not gently with clerical corruption. He edited the New Testament and dedicated it to Leo X. He had no desire to abandon the old Church, considering the bounties and pensions which he received were all derived from princes or clerics who adhered to the papacy. He pretended that he could not read the German writings of Luther. Erasmus wrote that "Luther's movement was not connected with learning," and, at the same time he wrote to Pope Hadrian VI.: "I could find a hundred passages where St. Paul seems to teach the doctrines which they condemn in Luther. "Other utterances show his unwillingness to serve the Reformation or to be held responsible for any part of it: I have written nothing which can be laid hold of against the established orders. . . . I would rather see things left as they are than to see a revolution which may lead to one knows not what. Others may be martyrs, if they like. I aspire to no such honor. . . . I care nothing what is done to Luther, but I care for peace. . . . If you must take a side, take the side which is most in favor." His keen sense of actual dependencies in the movement of things led him to see situations and realities with wonderful clearness; but his genius, like that of many scholars, was essentially negative. When he was fifty-one, not long before 1517, he wrote to Fabricius at Basel: "My chief fear is that with the revival of Greek literature there may be a revival of paganism. There are Christians who are Christians but in name, and are Gentiles at heart." In the fall of 1525, when central Germany had been affected by the Peasants' War, he wrote: "You remember Reuchlin. The conflict was raging between the Muses and their enemies, when up sprang Luther, and the object thenceforward was to entangle the friends of literature in the Lutheran business, so as to destroy both them and him together."

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Thomas Henry Huxley (1825—1895)

huxley
Thomas Henry Huxley, the distinguished zoologist and advocate of Darwinism, made several incursions into philosophy. From his youth he had studied its problems unsystematically; he had a way of going straight to the point in any discussion; and, judged by a literary standard, he was a great master of expository and argumentative prose. Apart from his special work in science, he had an important influence upon English thought through his numerous addresses and essays on the topics of science, philosophy, religion, and politics. Among the most important of his papers relevant here are those entitled 'The Physical Basis of Life' (1868), and 'On the Hypothesis that Animals are Automata' (1874), along with a monograph on Hume (1879) and the Romanes lecture Ethics and Evolution (1893). Huxley is credited with the invention of the term 'agnosticism' to describe his philosophical position: it expresses his attitude towards certain traditional questions without giving any clear delimitation of the frontiers of the knowable. He regards consciousness as a collateral effect of certain physical causes, and only an effect--never also a cause. But, on the other hand, he holds that matter is only a symbol, and that all physical phenomena can be analyzed into states of consciousness. This leaves mental facts in the peculiar position of being collateral effects of something that, after all, is only a symbol for a mental fact; and the contradiction is left without remark.

His contributions to ethics are still more remarkable. In a paper entitled 'Science and Morals' (1888), he concluded that the safety of morality lay "in a real and living belief in that fixed order of nature which sends social disorganization on the track of immorality." His Romanes lecture reveals a different tone. In it the moral order is contrasted with the cosmic order; evolution shows constant struggle; instead of looking to it for moral guidance, he "repudiates the gladiatorial theory of existence." He saw that the facts of historical process did not constitute validity for moral conduct; and his plain language compelled other to see the same truth. But he exaggerated the opposition between them and did not leave room for the influence of moral ideas as a factor in the historical process.

Another man of science, William Kingdon Clifford, professor of mathematics in London, dealt in occasional essays with some central points in the theory of knowledge, ethics, and religion. In these essays he aimed at an interpretation of life in the light of the new science. There was insight as well as courage in all he wrote, and it was conveyed in a brilliant style. But his work was cut short by his early death in 1879, and his contributions to philosophy remain suggestions only.

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Friedrich Heinrich Jacobi (1743—1819)

JacobiGerman philosopher; born at Dusseldorf January. 25,1743; died at Munich March. 10, 1819. He studied at Frankfort and Geneva, and in 1764 became the head of his father's business in Dusseldorf. After his appointment to the council for the duchies of Julich and Berg in 1772 he devoted himself entirely to literature and philosophy. His house at Pempelfort, near Dusseldorf, became the meeting-place of distinguished literary men. Among his more intimate friends were Wieland, Hamann, Herder, Lessing, and Goethe. On account of the political agitation of the time he went to Holstein in 1794. During the next ten years he resided chiefly at Wandsbeek, Hamburg, and Eutin. In 1804 he accepted a call to Munich in connection with the proposed Academy of Sciences there. He was president of the academy from its opening in 1807 till 1812. His writings are characterized by poetic fancy and religious sentiment rather than by logical necessity. He held that the understanding can only join and disjoin given facts, without explaining them, and that knowledge deduced in this way is conditioned and relatively unimportant, being always related to a background of existence which forever remains beyond abstract thinking. All demonstrable knowledge, therefore, is relative and conditioned; it does not touch the ultimate nature of things. The faculty by which we grasp ultimate facts is not the understanding, but faith, which Jacobi identified with reason. It was Jacobi who first pointed out the fatal contradiction involved in Kant's application of the category of causality to the Ding an Sich. His doctrine of the relativity of knowledge was later exploited by Sir William Hamilton. Jacobi's principal works are the two philosophical novels, Woldmwr (2 vols., Flensburg, 1779) and Eduard Allwills Briefsamlung (Breslau, 1781); Ueber die Lehre der Spinoza (1785; enlarged ed., 1789); Dazid Hunw fiber den Glauben, oder Ide-alis;nus und Realismus (1787), containing his criticism of Kant; Ueber das Unternehmen des Kritizismus, die Vernunft zu Verstande zu bringen (Hamburg, 1801); and Von den gottlichen Dingen und ihrer Offenbarung (Leipsic, 1811), which was directed against Schelling. During his last years Jacobi was employed in collecting and editing his Werke (6 vols., Leipsic, 1812-24). His Auserlesener Briefwechsel was edited by F. Roth (2 vols., 1825-27).

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James Frederick Ferrier (1808—1864)

Ferrier

Table of Contents

  1. Life the Writings
  2. Philosophy

1. Life the Writings

James Frederick Ferrier was born in Edinburgh on June 16, 1808, the son of John Ferrier, writer to the signet. Ferrier was educated by the Reverend H. Duncan, at the manse of Ruthwell, Dumfriesshire; and afterwards at Edinburgh High School, and under Dr. Charles Parr Burney, son of Dr. Charles Burney (1757-1817), at Greenwich. He was at the university of Edinburgh from 1825-1827, and then became a fellow-commoner of Magdalen College, Oxford, where he graduated BA. in 1831. He formed in the same year the acquaintance of Sir William Hamilton, whose influence upon him was very great, and for whose personal character and services to speculation he expresses the highest reverence. For years together he was almost daily in Hamilton's company for hours. In 1832 he became an advocate, but apparently never practiced. His metaphysical tastes, stimulated by Hamilton's influence, led him to spend some months at Heidelberg in 1834, in order to study German philosophy. He was on intimate terms with his aunt, Miss Ferrier, and his uncle, John Wilson, and in 1837 married his cousin, Margaret Anne, eldest daughter of John Wilson. He became a contributor to Blackwood's Magazine." He there wrote an article on Coleridge's plagiarisms in 1840. His first metaphysical publication was a series of papers, reprinted in his Remains, called "An Introduction to the Philosophy of Consciousness," in Blackwood's Magazine for 1838 and 1839.

In 1842 he was appointed professor of civil history in the university of Edinburgh; and in 1844-5 he lectured as William Hamilton's substitute. In 1845 he was elected professor of moral philosophy and political economy at St. Andrews. He was a candidate for the professorship of moral philosophy, resigned by Wilson in 1852, and for the professorship of logic and metaphysics vacated by Hamilton's death in 1856. But he was unsuccessful on both occasions, and continued at St. Andrews until his death. His chief work, the Institutes of Metaphysic, was published in 1854. The theory which it upholds had been already expounded to his class. It reached a second edition in 1856. In the same year he replied to his critics in a vigorous pamphlet called Scottish Philosophy, the Old and New, which, with certain omissions, is published as an "Appendix to the Institutes" in his Remains. He thought that the misunderstandings of his previous exposition had told against his candidature for the chair of metaphysics. Ferrier devoted himself to his professorial duties at St. Andrews; wrote and carefully rewrote his lectures, and lived chiefly in his study. He could seldom be persuaded to leave St. Andrews even for a brief excursion. An attack of angina pectoris in November 1861 weakened him permanently, though he continued to labor, and gave lectures in his own house. Renewed attacks followed in 1863, and he died at St. Andrews on June 11, 1864. After his death his minor publications were collected and published together along with a series of lectures as Lectures on Greek Philosophy and other philosophical remains (1866).

2. Philosophy

Ferrier provides the earliest, and in some ways the most impressive, statement of absolute idealism in English philosophy. As an historian of philosophy Ferrier did not pretend to exceptional research; but he had an ability to give a living presentation of their views. The history of philosophy was, for him, no mere record of discarded systems but "philosophy itself taking its time." He was a sympathetic student of the German philosophers, banned by his friend Hamilton. It is difficult to trace any direct influence of Hegel upon his own doctrine, and indeed he said that he could not understand Hegel. But both his earlier and his later writings have an affinity with Fichte -- especially in their central doctrine: the stress laid on self-consciousness, and its distinction from the "mental states" with which the psychologist is concerned. This doctrine connects him with Berkeley also. He was one of the first to appreciate the true nature of Berkeley's thought, as not a mere transition-stage between Locke and Hume, but as a discovery of the spiritual nature of reality.

In an essay on "Berkeley and Idealism," published in 1842, perhaps Ferrier's most perfect piece of philosophical writing, he signalizes both the essential truth and the essential defect in a theory which was at the time much less understood than it is now. Berkeley, he says, "certainly was the first to stamp the indelible impress of his powerful understanding on those principles of our nature, which, since his time, have brightened into imperishable truths in the light of genuine speculation. His genius was the first to swell the current of that mighty stream of tendency towards which all modern meditation flows, the great gulf-stream of Absolute Idealism." The element o peculiar value in Berkeley's speculation is its concreteness, its faithfulness to reality.

The peculiar endowment by which Berkeley was distinguished, far beyond almost every philosopher who has succeeded him, was the eye he had for facts, and the singular pertinacity with which he refused to be dislodged from his hold upon them. . . . No man ever delighted less to expatiate in the regions of the occult, the abstract, the impalpable, the fanciful, and the unknown. His heart and soul clung with inseparable tenacity to the concrete realties of the universe; and with an eye uninfluenced by spurious theories, and unperverted by false knowledge, he saw directly into the very life of things.

His theory needs only to be widened, and thus corrected, to provide the true explanation of which philosophy is in search. How this is to be done, is more clearly stated in the Institutes.

He saw that something subjective was a necessary and inseparable part of every object of cognition. But instead of maintaining that it was the ego or oneself which clove inseparably to all that could be known, and that this element must be thought of along with all that is thought of, he rather held that it was the senses, or our perceptive modes of cognition, which clove inseparably to all that could be known, and that these required to be thought of along with all that could be thought of. These, just as much as the ego, were held by him to be the subjective part of the total synthesis of cognition which could not by any possibility be discounted. Hence the unsatisfactory character of his ontology, which, when tried by the test of a rigorous logic, will be found to invest the Deity -- the supreme mind, the infinite ego, which the terms of his system necessarily compel him to place in synthesis with all things -- with human modes of apprehension, with such senses as belong to man -- and to invest Him with these, not as a matter of contingency, but as a matter these, not as a matter of necessity. Our only safety lies in the consideration -- a consideration which is a sound, indeed inevitable logical inference -- that our sensitive modes of apprehension are mere contingent elements and conditions of cognition; and that the ego or subject alone enters, of necessity, into the composition of everything which any intelligence can know.

Although there are occasional references to Kant in Ferrier's works, he develops his theory through a continuous criticism of Reid, on the one hand, and of Hamilton, on the other. Reid is, for him, the representative of Psychology or the "science of the human mind," and therefore, despite his own protestations to the contrary, of "Representationism." Hamilton is the representative of Agnosticism, or the doctrine of the unknowableness of the Absolute Reality. Against the former view, he argues that we have a direct knowledge of Reality, both material and spiritual; against the latter, he formulates his "agnoiology" or "theory of ignorance," to prove that the "ignorance" of which Hamilton would convict the human mind is not properly called ignorance or defect, but is simply that repudiation of the unintelligible or self-contradictory which is the essential characteristic of intelligence, rather than a defect peculiar to the human mind.

The fundamental error of Psychology is the acceptance of sensation, or the "state of consciousness," as the original datum of knowledge, the consequence being that the inference to the existence of the object, as well as to the subject, is more or less uncertain. As a matter of fact, the subject and the object are inseparable. "Matter per se" is never the object of knowledge; what we perceive is always "Matter mecum." The elementary fact of knowledge is not matter, but the perception of matter, or the subject as conscious of the object, either subjective or objective. Mere "phenomena" never exist; what exists is always phenomenal to a self or subject. If we define "substance" as that which is capable of existing, or of being conceived, alone and independently, then the conscious self, that is, the subject as conscious of an object, is substance, and can be known. The ego cannot know objects without knowing itself along with them; it cannot know itself except along with objects. It is because the psychologists have ignored the conscious, or rather the self-conscious self, which is present in all knowledge, that they have been unable to escape the conclusion that all we know is "ideas" or "phenomena" which represent, and may misrepresent, the object or substantial reality.

For the refutation of the Hamiltonian doctrine of the Relativity of Knowledge, Ferrier formulated what he regarded as an entirely original "theory of ignorance." Ignorance, he holds, presupposes the possibility of knowledge; we can be ignorant only of that which it is possible for us to know. It is not a defect, but a merit of knowledge not to know that which cannot be known because it is the unintelligible or the self-contradictory. Now we have seen that subject and object, or mind and matter, per se, are both alike unknowable in this sense; since they are never presented in consciousness alone but always together, it follows that they cannot be represented or thought in separation from one another. It is of such an inconceivable or unintelligible reality that Hamilton proclaims that ignorance is inevitable; he might as well proclaim the unknowableness of Nothing, or of Nonsense. It is the glory, rather than the humiliation, of intelligence to repudiate the unintelligible or self-contradictory.

On the basis of this "epistemology" and "agnoiology" Ferrier proceeds to construct his "ontology." Self-conscious mind, the ultimate element in knowledge, is also the ultimate element in existence. Repudiating the errors of subjective idealism, he finds himself compelled to accept absolute or objective idealism. The individual ego, along with the universe of his thought, is not independent. "The only independent universe which any mind or ego can think of is the universe in synthesis with some other mind or ego." And since one such other mind is sufficient to account for the universe of our experience, we are warranted in inferring that there is only one. Ferrier thus summarizes the argument which yields "this theistic conclusion":

Speculation shows us that the universe, by itself, is the contradictory; that it is incapable of self-subsistency, that it can exist only cum alio, that all true and cogitable and non-contradictory existence is a synthesis of the subjective and the objective; and then we are compelled, by the most stringent necessity of thinking, to conceive a supreme intelligence as the ground and essence of the Universal Whole. Thus the postulation of the Deity is not only permissible, it is unavoidable. Every mind thinks, and must think of God (however little conscious it may be of the operation which it is performing), whenever it thinks of anything as lying beyond all human observation, or as subsisting in the absence or annihilation of all finite intelligences.

The ethical implications of such an idealism are strikingly suggested in the Philosophy of Consciousness, where the parallelism between the functions of self-consciousness in the intellectual and in the moral spheres is made clear, and it is shown that "just as all perception originates in the antagonism between consciousness and our sensations, so all morality originates in the antagonism between consciousness and the passions, desires, or inclinations of the natural man." It is in this refusal to accept the guidance of the natural passions and inclinations, this "direct antithesis" of the "I" to the "natural man," that our moral freedom consists. What is this supreme act by which man asserts his supremacy over nature, within and without himself?

What is it but the act of consciousness, the act of becoming "I," the act of placing ourselves in the room which sensation and passion have been made to vacate? This act may be obscure in the extreme, but still it is an act of the most practical kind, both in itself and in its results. . . . For what act can be more vitally practical than the act by which we realize our existence as free personal beings? and what act can be attended by a more practical result than the act by which we look our passions in the face, and, in the very act of looking at them, look them down?

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Euclides (c. 430—360 B.C.E.)

Euclides was a native of Megara, and founder of the Megarian or Eristic sect. He applied himself early to the study of philosophy, and learned from the writings of Parmenides the art of disputation. Hearing of the fame of Socrates, Euclides moved to Athens and became a devoted student for many years. Because of an enmity between Athenians and Megarians, a decree was passed which forbid any Megarian from entering Athens under the penalty of death. Euclides moved twenty miles out of Athens, and would sneak into the city at night for instruction, dressed as a woman in a long cloak and veil. He frequently became involved in business disputes in civil courts. Socrates, who despised forensic contests, expressed dissatisfaction with Euclides for his fondness for controversy. It is likely that this provoked a separation between Euclides and Socrates, for after this Euclides was the head of a school in Megara which taught the art of disputation. Debates were conducted with so much vehemence among his pupils, that Timon said of Euclides that he carried the madness of contention from Athens of Megara (Diog. Laert, 6:22). Nevertheless, his restraint is attested to in a story about a quarrel he had with his brother. His brother charged, "Let me perish if do not have revenge on you." To this Euclides replied, "And let me perish if I don not subdue your resentment by forbearance, and make you love me as much as ever." In disputes Euclides was averse to the analogical method of reasoning, and judged that legitimate argumentation consists in deducing fair conclusions from acknowledge premises.

His position was a combination of Socraticism and Eleaticism. Virtue is knowledge, but knowledge of what? It is here that the Eleatic influence became visible. With Parmenides, the Megarics believed in the one Absolute being. All multiplicity, all motion, are illusory. The world of sense has in it no true reality. Only Being is. If virtue is knowledge, therefore, it can only be the knowledge of this Being. If the essential concept of Socrates was the Good, and the essential concept of Parmenides Being, Euclides now combined the two. Thus, according to Cicero, he defined the "supreme good" as that which is always the same. The Good is identified with Being. Being, the One, God, Intelligence, providence, the Good, divinity, are merely different names for the same thing. Becoming, the many, evil, are the names of its opposite, not-being. Multiplicity is thus identified with evil, and both are declared illusory. Evil has no real existence. The good alone truly is. The various virtues, as benevolence, temperance, prudence, are merely different names for the one virtue, knowledge of being. It is said that when Euclides was asked his opinion concerning the gods, he replied, "I know nothing more of them than this, that they hate inquisitive persons."

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Meister Eckhart (1260—1328)

Meister Eckhart was a thirteenth-fourteenth century philosopher, theologian, and mystic who lived and worked in the Dominican Order. It seems he enjoyed a relatively successful academic life and was considered to be an able orator and preacher. Enough of his work has been recovered for scholars to be to able to discern and explicate certain of his themes and concerns; these include the nature of God, The Trinity, the relationship of the human soul to God, and the processes inherent in these and other Christian concerns. Views on sin and redemption, Christ, and ethics are also expounded.  The existing works are in the form of sermons, and fragments of a more substantial three-part work called the Opus tripartitum. Eckhart's views may have teetered toward heresy at times. There is no doubt this caused him a little trouble, though all the details are not clear. Overall he seems to have inspired both admiration and suspicion in various factions. Though not a systematic philosopher, Eckhart's insights and contributions remain a source of curiosity to modern readers both inside and outside of the academy.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Works
  3. View of God
  4. Trinitarian Process
  5. God in Creation
  6. Relation of the Soul to God
  7. Sin and Redemption
  8. Place of Christ
  9. Ethics

1. Life

The long controverted question concerning the locality of Eckhart's origin has been settled by Denifle, who states that he was born at Hochheim, a village eight miles north of Gotha. The year of his birth was probably 1260, and he joined the Dominicans at Erfurt. The lighter studies he no doubt followed at Cologne. Later he was prior at Erfurt and provincial of Thuringia. In 1300 he was sent to Paris to lecture and take the academical degrees, and remained there till 1303. In the latter year he returned to Erfurt, and was made provincial for Saxony, a province which reached at that time from the Netherlands to Livonia. Complaints made against him and the provincial of Teutonia at the general chapter held in Paris in 1306 concerning irregularities among the ternaries, must have been trivial, because the general, Aymeric, appointed him in the following year his vicar-general for Bohemia with full power to set the demoralized monasteries there in order. In 1311 Eckhart was appointed by the general chapter of Naples as teacher at Paris. Then follows a long period of which it is known only that he spent part of the time at Strasburg (see Urkundenbuch der Stadt Strassburg, iii. 236). A passage in a chronicle of the year 1320, extant in manuscript (see Preger, i. 352-399), speaks of a prior Eckhart at Frankfort who was suspected of heresy, and some have referred this to Meister Eckhart; but it is highly improbable that a man under suspicion of heresy would have been appointed teacher in one of the most famous schools of the order.

Eckhart next appears as teacher at Cologne, and the archbishop, Hermann von Virneburg, accused him of heresy before the pope. But Nicholas of Strasburg , to whom the pope had given the temporary charge of the Dominican monasteries in Germany, exonerated him. The archbishop, however, pressed his charges against Eckhart and against Nicholas before his own court. The former now denied the competency of the archiepiscopal inquisition and demanded litterce dimissorix (apostoli) for an appeal to the pope (see the document in Preger, i. 471; more accurately in ALKG, ii. 627 and what follows.). On February 13, 1327, he stated in his protest, which was read publicly, that he had always detested everything wrong, and should anything of the kind be found in his writings, he now retracts. Of the further progress of the case there is no information, except that John XXII. issued a bull (In agro dominico), March 27, 1329, in which a series of statements from Eckhart is characterized as heretical; another as suspected of heresy (the bull is given complete in ALKG, ii. 636-640). At the close it is stated that Eckhart recanted before his death everything which he had falsely taught, by subjecting himself and his writing to the decision of the apostolic see. By this is no doubt meant the statement of February 13, 1327; and it may be inferred that Eckhart's death, concerning which no information exists, took place shortly after that event. In 1328 the general chapter of the order at Toulouse decided to proceed against preachers who "endeavor to preach subtle things which not only do (not) advance morals, but easily lead the people into error." Eckhart's disciples were admonished to be more cautious, but nevertheless they cherished the memory of their master.

2. Works

For centuries none of Eckhart's writings were known except a number of sermons, found in the old editions of Tauler's sermons, published by Kachelouen (Leipzig, 1498) and by Adam Petri (Basel, 1521 and 1522). In 1857 Franz Pfeiffer in the second volume of his Deutsche Mystiker (Stuttgart), which is wholly devoted to Eckhart, added considerable manuscript material. Pfeiffer was followed by others, especially Franz Jostes, Meister Eckhart und seine Junger, ungedruckte Texte zur Geschichte der deutschen Mystik (Collectanea Friburgensia, iv., Freiburg, 1895). But some pieces are of doubtful genuineness, and the tradition concerning others is very unsatisfactory. It was a great surprise when in 1880 and 1886 H. Denifle discovered at Erfurt and Cues two manuscripts with Latin works of Eckhart, the existence of which Nicholas of Cusa and Trittenheim had indeed mentioned, but which had since then been considered lost. There can be no doubt as to their genuineness, but thus far only the (comparatively extensive) specimens which Denifle had published (in ALKG, ii.) are known. The extant writings appear to be only parts of a very large work, the Opus tripartitum, which, to judge from the prologue in the first part treated of more than 1,000 propositions, in the second part debated a number of special questions, and in the third part, first expounded Biblical texts (opus sermonum) and afterward explained the books of the Bible in their order with special reference to the important passages. Entirely unknown at present are the contents of the more important manuscript of Cues, especially the exposition of the Gospel of John, which may contain information on many things.

3. View of God

As has already been stated it is impossible to give at present a final decision on Eckhart's world of ideas. Nevertheless an attempt may be made to delineate his fundamental thoughts, based upon the material at hand. The great need of man is that his soul be united with God; for this a knowledge of God and his relation to the world, a knowledge of the soul and the way which it must go, are necessary. Eckhart does not doubt that such knowledge is given in the traditional faith of the Church, but it is not sufficient for one who is longing for salvation. He must attain to it with his own understanding. Eckhart accordingly does not move and live in ecclesiastical tradition after the manner of Bernard of Clairvaux or Hugo of Saint Victor; in his thinking on the highest questions he is independent and in this way he arrives at views which do not harmonize with the teaching of the Church, without, however, as far as can be seen, being conscious of any opposition. The last and highest object of thinking is the Deity, that is, the divine entity as distinguished from the persons, yet Eckhart often uses "God" in the sense of "Deity," where his thought does not call for accurate definitions (but see, on the other hand, 180, 14; 181, 7). The Deity is absolute being without distinction of place or manner (ALKG, ii. 439-440). No predicate derived from finite being is applicable to the Deity; but this is therefore not mere negation or emptiness. Rather is finite being, as such, negation; and the Deity, as the negation of finite being, is the negation of negation, that is, the absolute fulness of being (322, 131 539, 10-27). Dionysius wrongly states: God is not, he is rather a nonentity. When in other passages (82, 26; 182, 31; 500, 27) Eckhart himself designates God as non-existent, he only means that he has none of the characteristics of finite existence. The same apparent contradiction is found, where Eckhart on the one hand calls God absolute being, and on the other denies that he is a being (319, 4; 659, 1); but he reconciles the two views (268-269). The same is the case with occasional seemingly paradoxical expressions such as, for example, that God is not good. (269, 18; 318, 35-319, 3). The essential elements of finite things are present in God, but in an exalted degree and in a manner that can not be comprehended by man (322, 20; 540, 2-7).

4. Trinitarian Process

The absolute, unqualified being of the Deity Eckhart also calls unnatured nature. This unnatured nature, however, manifests itself in the natured nature, the three persons. The Trinity is the self-revelation of the Deity (540, 31; 390,12-22). In it God comprises himself. Accordingly, Eckhart attributes to the Father a sort of genesis; only the Deity is absolutely without any progression and reposes everlastingly in itself. The Father was made through himself (534, 17). This self-revelation of God Eckhart designates as a cognition, a speaking, or a demeanor. The Father perceives the whole fulness of the Deity (6,S); or, what is the same, he speaks a single word, which comprises everything (70, 25). He procreates the Son (284, 12); for the Father is father only through the Son. The Son, however, is in everything like the Father, only that he procreates not,(337, 3). The essence of the Father is also that of the Son, and the essence in both is no other than that of the Deity. From the pleasure and love which both have for each other springs the Holy Ghost (497, 26). Eckhart leaves no doubt that the entire trinitarian process must not be conceived of as a temporal one, but as a process extending throughout eternity (254, 10). Preger thought that Eckhart's distinction between Deity and God should be interpreted as a distinction between potentiality and actuality. To this interpretation Denifle (ALKG, ii. 453 and what follows) has strongly objected and cited Eckhart's Latin writings, in which he, with Thomas Aquinas and others, designates God as actus purus, thus excluding all potentiality. Denifle is right, in that Eckhart does not consciously and deliberately make any such distinction; but it can not be denied that his conception leads to it. Especially significant is Eckhart's explanation in 175, 7 and what follows, where he tries to illustrate the relation between the fatherhood as it is determined in the Deity and the paternity of the person of the Father by the relation between the maternity peculiar to the Virgin as such, and the maternity which she acquires by bearing. But this is exactly the relation of potentiality and actuality (see also the peculiar passage 193, 33). It must be admitted that Eckhart here expresses two views which can not be harmonized with one another, though the second is not fully developed. Eckhart had a wealth of ingenious ideas, but he was unable to systematize them.

5. God in Creation

The self-manifestation of God in the Trinity is followed by his manifestation in his creatures. Everything in them that is truly real is God's eternal being; but God's being does not manifest itself thus in its entire fulness (101, 34; 173, 26; 503, 26). In this antithesis may be expressed the relation of Eckhart's philosophy to pantheism, both as regards similarities and differences. According to Eckhart God's creatures have not, as Thomas Aquinas held, merely ideal preexistence in God, that is, their conceptual essence (essential quidditas) coming from the divine intelligence, but their existence (esse) being foreign to the divine being. Rather is the true being of the creatures immanent in the divine being. On the other hand, every peculiarity distinguishing, creatures from each other is something negative; and in this sense it is said that the creatures are a mere nothing. Should God withdraw from his creatures his being, they would disappear as the shadow on the wall disappears when the wall is removed (31, 2). This perishable being is the creature confined within the limits of space and time (87, 49). On the other hand, every creature, considered according to its true entity, is eternal. It is obvious that this necessarily involves a modification of the idea of creation. Even Augustine and the Schoolmen felt this difficulty. While they did not, like Eckhart connect the existence of the world with the being of God they did consider it unallowable to attribute to God any temporary activity. Albert the Great tried to avoid the difficulty with the sentence, "God created all things from eternity, but things were not created from eternity"; but this is more easily said than conceived. According to the bull of 1329 (p. 2), Eckhart asserted that "it may be conceded that the world was from eternity." It is impossible here to investigate this view further; but reference must be made to the close relation into which Eckhart brings the process of the Trinity and the genesis, or progress, of the world, both of the real and the ideal world (76, 52; 254, 16; 284, 12; and Commentary in Genesis; ALKG, ii. 553, 13-17).

6. Relation of the Soul to God

The unqualified Deity, the Trinity (birth of the Son or of the Eternal Lord), and the creation of the world are to him three immediate moments, which follow each other in conceptual, not temporal sequence. All creatures have part in the divine essence; but this is true of the soul in a higher degree. In the irrational creature there is something of God; but in the soul God is divine (230, 26; 2,31, 4). Though God speaks his word in all creatures, only rational creatures can preserve it (479, 19). In other words, in the soul, where he has his resting-place, God is subjective, while in the rest of creation he is merely objective. The soul is an image of God, in so far as its chief powers, memory, reason, and will, answer to the divine persons (319, 1). This accords with the view of Augustine. Just as there is the absolute Deity, which is superior to the persons of the Godhead, so in the soul there is something that is superior to its own powers. This is the innermost background of the soul, which Eckhart frequently calls a "spark," or "little spark." In its real nature this basis of the soul is one with the Deity (66, 2). When Eckhart sometimes speaks of it as uncreated (286, 16; 311, 6), and then again as created, this does not involve a contradiction. While, on the one hand, it rests eternally in the Deity, on the other, it entered into the temporal existence of the soul, that is, was made or created through grace. But it is not in this original unity with God that the soul finds its perfection and bliss. As it has a subjective being, it must turn to God, in order that the essential principle implanted in it may be truly realized. It is not enough that it was made by God; God must come and be in it. But this has taken place without hindrance only in the human soul of Christ (67, 12). For all other souls sin is an obstacle.

7. Sin and Redemption

But wherein does sin consist? Not in the finiteness, which is never removed from the soul (3S7, 3; 500, 1 1), but in the direction of the will toward the finite and its pleasure therein (476, 19; 674, 17). The possibility of sin, however, is based in finiteness, taken together with the free will of the creature. If it is the destiny of the soul to be the resting-place of God, then the direction of the will toward the finite makes this impossible; and it is this that constitutes sin. Redemption, therefore, can take place only when the creature makes room in his soul for the work of God; and the condition for that is the turning away from the finite. For God is ever ready to work in the soul, provided he is not hindered and the soul is susceptible to his influence (27, 25; 283, 23; 33, 29; 479, 31). The inner separation from everything casual, sensual, earthly and the yielding to the work of God in the heart; that is the seclusion or tranquillity of which Eckhart speaks again and again. For him this is the basis of all piety. But what is it that God accomplishes in the soul? This can be stated in a word: the birth of the son. As the soul is an image of the Deity, if it is to fulfil its destiny, then that process by which the deity develops into the three persons must take place in it. The father procreates in the soul the son (44, 28; 175, 15-20; 479, 10; 13, 12). This takes place during the life of the soul in time; and, too, not merely at a particular moment, but rather continuously and repeatedly. This is not merely a copy or analogon of that inner divine process, but is in truth that very process itself, by which it becomes, through grace, what the Son of God is by nature (433, 32; 382, 7; 377, 17). From this view of Eckhart's follow a number of the most striking statements in which the soul is made to share in the attributes and works of God, including the creation (119, 28-40; 267, 4; 283, 37-284, 7). However, according to Eckhart, a complete fusion of the soul with the Deity never takes place (387, 3). He also opposes the doctrine of Apocatastasis (65, 20; 402, 34; 470, 22).

8. Place of Christ

According to Eckhart sin is not the real cause of the incarnation (591, 34). God wished rather to receive the nature of things through grace in time just as he had them by nature in eternity in himself (574, 34). Just as a man occupies a central position in the world, since he leads all creatures back to God, so Christ stands in the center of humanity (180, 7; 390, 37.) The same thought is found in Maximus the Confessor and Erigena, but whence did Eckhart get it? Even at the creation of the first man Christ was already the end in view (250, 23); and now after the fact of sin, Christ stands likewise in the center of redemption. After the fall all creatures worked together to produce a man who should restore the harmony (497, 11). This took place when Mary resigned herself so completely to the divine word that the eternal word could assume human nature in her. However, this temporal birth of the son is again included in his eternal birth as a moment of the same (391, 20). And now God is to be born in us. In his human life Jesus becomes a pattern for man; and in all that he did and experienced, above all in his passion and death there is an overwhelming power that draws man to God (218-219) and brings about in us that which first took place in Christ, who alone is the way to the father (241, 17).

9. Ethics

Whatever one may think of Eckhart's philosophical and dogmatic speculations, his ethical view, at any rate, is of rare purity and sublimity. The inner position of man, the disposition of the heart, is for him the main thing (56, 39; 297, 11; 444, S; 560, 43) and with him this is not a result of reflection. One feels that it comes from the core of his personality; and no doubt this was the principal reason for the deep impression his sermons made. He speaks little of church ceremonies. For him outward penances have only a limited value. That man inwardly turn to God and be led by him; that is the main purpose of Eckhart's exhortations. Let no one think because this or that great saint has done and suffered many things, that he should imitate him. God gives to each his task, and leaves every one on his way (560 and what follows, 177, 26-35). No one can express the fact more definitely than does Eckhart, that it is not works that justify man, but that man must first be righteous in order to do righteous works. Nor does he recommend that one flee from the world, but flee from oneself, from selfishness, and self-will. Otherwise one finds as little peace in the cell as outside of it. Though he sees in suffering the most effective and most valuable means of inner purification, still he does not mean that one should seek sufferings of his own choosing, but only bear patiently whatever God imposes. He recognizes that it is natural for one to be affected either pleasantly or unpleasantly by the various sense-impressions; but in the innermost depths of the soul one must hold fast to God and allow himself to be moved by nothing (52, 1; 427, 22). It need hardly be added that he regards highly works of charity. Even supreme rapture should not prevent one from rendering a service to the poor. It is noteworthy that, in the ninth sermon, he puts Martha higher than Mary, though by a strange misinterpretation of the text. While Mary enjoyed only the sweetness of the Lord, being yet a learner, Martha had passed this stage. She stood firm in the substance, and no work hindered her, but every work helped her to blessedness. Future investigations will presumably make possible a more accurate estimate of the importance of Eckhart; but it is hardly possible that they will overthrow the verdict of Suso and Tauler concerning him.

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Eclecticism

greek_coin"Eclecticism" is a name given to a group of ancient philosophers who, from the existing philosophical beliefs, tried to select the doctrines that seemed to them most reasonable, and out of these constructed a new system (see Diogenes Laertius, 21). The name was first generally used in the first century BCE. Stoicism and Epicureanism had made the search for pure truth subordinate to the attainment of practical virtue and happiness. Skepticism had denied that pure truth was possible to discover. Eclecticism sought to reach by selection the highest possible degree of probability, in the despair of attaining to what is absolutely true. In Greek philosophy, the best known Eclectics were the Stoics Panaetius (150 BCE.) and Posidonius (75 BCE.). The New Academic, Carnaedes (155 BCE.), and Philo of Larissa (75 BCE.). Among the Romans, Cicero, whose cast of mind made him always doubtful and uncertain of his own attitude, was thoroughly eclectic, uniting the Peripatetic, Stoic, and New Academic doctrines, and seeking the probable (illud probabile). The same general line was followed by Varro, and in the next century the Stoic Seneca propounded a philosophical system largely based on eclecticism.

In the late period of Greek philosophy there appears an eclectic system consisting of a compromise between the Neo-Pythagoreans and the various Platonic sects. Still another school is that of Philo Iudaeus, who at Alexandria, in the first century CE. interpreted the Old Testament allegorically, and tried to harmonize it with selected doctrines of Greek philosophy. Neo-Platonism, the last product of Greek speculation, was also a fusion of Greek philosophy with eastern religion. Its chief representatives were Plotinus (230 CE.), Porphyrius (275 CE.), Iamblichus (300 CE.), and Proclus (450 CE.). The desire of this school was to attain right relations between God and humans, and was thus religious.

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Encyclopedists

"Encyclopedists" is the name usually applied to the group of French philosophers and men of letters who collaborated in the production of the famous Encyclopedie, or were in sympathy with its principles. The work was planned by Denis Diderot, and was announced as a Dictionnaire raisonne des sciences, des arts, et des metiers. The intention was to provide a complete alphabetical treatment of the whole field of human knowledge from the standpoint of the "Enlightenment". The contributors included a number of remarkable men. First in importance, acting with Diderot on equal terms, was D'Alembert. A large part of the work was done by the Chevalier de Jaucourt, a man of encyclopedic learning. When he died in 1755, Montesquieu left behind an unfinished article on "Taste." Voltaire wrote some articles, and constantly advised on the development of the plan. Roussear contributed articles on music, but ultimately quarreled with the editors, whose plan was so different from his. Turgot wrote on economic subjects, and in the latter part of the work Haller, the physiologist, and Conddorcet were engaged.

The first volume appeared in 1751, the second in the following January, and immediately excited the antagonism of the Church and the conservatives. On February 12, 1752, the two volumes were suppressed by the Council, as containing maxims contrary to royal authority and to religion. Further publication was suspended for eighteen months, but from 1753 to 1757 it went on without interruption. After the seventh volume, the forces of conservatism rallied to a fresh attack. The sale of the volumes already printed; as well as the printing of any more, was forbidden. Diderot, however, made his plans to continue privately to prepare the remaining volumes. D'Alembert withdrew, but Diderot toiled on and completed the work (28 volumes, Paris, 1751-72). Andre Franois Lebreton acquired a large interest in the undertaking and all the contributions were set up as they were written, but when Diderot had corrected the last proof, Lebreton and his foreman, without informing his partners, secretly cut out such parts from each articles as he thought too radical or likely to give offense. In this way many of the best articles were mutilated, and to prevent the restoration of the eliminated matter, Lebreton burned the original manuscripts. Subsequently a supplement was published (5 volumes, Amsterdam, Paris, 1776-77), also an index (2 volumes, 17880).

The Encyclopedie was both a repository of information and a polemical arsenal. It was an idea of the editors that if civilization should by entirely destroyed, mankind might turn to their volumes to learn to reconstruct it. No other collection of general information so large and so useful was then in existence. Yet mere learning was not what lay nearest to the hearts of Diderot and his fellows; the prided themselves even more on the firm and bold philosophy of some of the writers. The metaphysics is founded chiefly on Locke, who "may be said to have created metaphysics as Newton created physics," by reducing the science to "what in fact should be the experimental physics of the soul." Beyond this there is little unity of opinion, though the same spirit rules throughout. It includes a prejudice in favor of democracy, as the ideal form of government, and the worship of theoretical equality, but contempt for the populace, "which discern"; the reduction of religion to sentiments of morality and benevolence, and great dislike for its minister, especially the religious orders. By its generous professions of philosophic tolerance, and apparent acquiescence in what for the moment it was too weak to overpower, the philosophic school won a hearing for doctrines which were essentially subversive of the established order of things in both Church and State, and prepared the way for overt revolution.

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Henry St. John Bolingbroke (1678—1751)

bolingbroke

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Philosophy

1. Life

Henry St. John Bolingbroke was born in Battersea England in 1678. He was educated at Eton and Oxford, after which he traveled about two years on the continent. In 1700, shortly after his return, he married the daughter of Sir Henry Winchcomb, from whom he soon separated. Up to this period, he was chiefly known for his extreme dissipation but, after entering parliament in 1701, he devoted himself to politics, joined the Tory party, and soon made himself prominent as an orator. In 1704 he was made secretary of war and retained this office until 1708 when the Whigs came into power, after which he retired from politics and applied himself to study. After resignation, Bolingbroke retained great influence as the queen's favorite counselor. On the fall of the Whig party in 1710, he was made secretary of state for foreign affairs. In 1712, he was called to the house of lords by the title of Viscount Bolingbroke and in 1713, against the wishes of nearly the entire nation, concluded the peace of Utrecht. Having previously quarreled with his old friend Harley, now the Earl of Oxford and his most powerful rival, he contrived his dismissal in July 1714. Bolingbroke immediately proceeded to form a strong Jacobite ministry in accordance with the well-known inclinations of his royal mistress, whose death a few days after threw into disorder his dangerous and unprincipled schemes. The accession of George I was a deathblow to Bolingbroke's political prospects, on August 28 he was deposed from office, in March 1715 he fled to France and, in August 1715 he was attainted. For some time he held the office of secretary of state to the Pretender, but his restless and ambitious spirit yearned for the 'large excitement' of English politics. Bolingbroke's efforts to obtain a pardon were not successful and he retired to a small estate which he had purchased near Orleans. In 1718 his first wife died and, in 1720, he married the rich widow of the Marquis de Vilette.

A prudent use of this lady's wealth enabled him to return to England in September 1724. His property was restored to him, but he was never permitted to take his seat in parliament. He therefore removed himself to his villa at Dawley, near Uxbridge, where he occasionally enjoyed the society of Swift, Pope, and others of his old friends with whom he had corresponded in his exile. It was at Dawley where Bolingbroke diversified his moral and metaphysical studies by his attacks on the ministry in his periodical the Craftsman, in which the letters forming his Dissertation on Parties first appeared. In 1735, finding his political hopes clouded forever, he went back to France and continued to live there until 1742. During his second residence abroad, he wrote his Letters on the Study of History in which he violently attacked the Christian religion. He died on October 1, 1751, after a long illness. His talents were brilliant and versatile; his style of writing was polished and eloquent; but his fatal lack of sincerity and honest purpose, and the low and unscrupulous ambition which made him scramble for power with a selfish indifference to national security, hindered him from looking wisely and deeply into any question. His philosophical theories are not profound, nor his conclusions solid, while his criticism of passing history is worthless.

2. Philosophy

Bolingbroke's philosophical writings were mostly unprinted until after his death, when David Mallet published a five-volume collection of Bolingbroke's works. The philosophical portions of this collection display his dependence on Locke, who Bolingbroke acknowledged as his "master." Using Locke's ideas and his own, Bolingbroke attempts to explain how one attains knowledge and what its limits are, as well as asserting his own beliefs about God and religion. In doing so, he makes virulent attacks on previous philosophers such as Plato, Malebranche, and Berkley.

Following Locke, Bolingbroke distinguishes between ideas of sensation and ideas of reflection. Borrowing further from Locke, he calls these "simple ideas" and says they are the materials out of which complex ideas are made. He goes on to say that although one may not understand the process by which objects produce sensory perceptions, one can know they do so. Likewise, one may not know how the will causes action, such as the movement of an arm, but this does not hinder one from knowing it is the will which causes it. He presents these beliefs as clear and obvious and in no need of being questioned. Bolingbroke gives less power, than does Locke, to the mind concerning its ability to combine ideas within itself, putting this power in nature instead. Bolingbroke also maintains that nature (the observable world) serves as a reliable guide, and error comes when one uses one's faculties out of accordance with nature.

Bolingbroke is known for being a Deist. He asserts there is a God, and proving this by reason is possible. However, this God is not at all like humans, and Bolingbroke speaks of anthropomorphism with contempt. Instead, he says God is so dissimilar to human beings, the distance between them is unimaginable and no comparison between the two is possible. Bolingbroke uses the cosmological argument to demonstrate there is a God, but goes on to assert that this God is omnipotent and omniscient and always does what is best. (Bolingbroke even claims this is the best of all possible worlds.) In order to defend his view of God's transcendence, Bolingbroke says that while one can be certain God knows everything, one can never comprehend the way in which He knows things, and goes as far as to say God's manner of knowing cannot be understood by human beings. God's morality is equally beyond human understanding. Our moral values are based solely on our existence as social beings who cannot live lives of isolation or follow a path of pure selfishness. These morals can be discovered by reason. While they arise out of the nature of things created by God, they are in no way indicative of a divine sense of morality. God created the world, and the nature of the world determines morality. However, this nature does not reflect the character or nature of God.

Bolingbroke states Christianity was originally a "complete" and "very plain system of religion," was actually no more than the "natural religion," and Jesus did not teach anything more than could be discovered by reason. Bolingbroke expresses regret that Christian teachings did not remain at their initial, simple level, and wishes they had never been corrupted by such systems as Platonism, which he regards as the product of mere imagination. His understanding of religion furthermore denies the validity of prayer by insisting one could not come into contact with one's deity, denigrates the importance of the crucifixion in Christianity, and suggests one cannot know whether or not there is a soul which survives the death of the body.

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Rudolf Carnap (1891—1970)

carnap02Rudolf Carnap, a German-born philosopher and naturalized U.S. citizen, was a leading exponent of logical positivism and was one of the major philosophers of the twentieth century. He made significant contributions to philosophy of science, philosophy of language, the theory of probability, inductive logic and modal logic. He rejected metaphysics as meaningless because metaphysical statements cannot be proved or disproved by experience. He asserted that many philosophical problems are indeed pseudo-problems, the outcome of a misuse of language. Some of them can be resolved when we recognize that they are not expressing matters of fact, but rather concern the choice between different linguistic frameworks. Thus the logical analysis of language becomes the principal instrument in resolving philosophical problems. Since ordinary language is ambiguous, Carnap asserted the necessity of studying philosophical issues in artificial languages, which are governed by the rules of logic and mathematics. In such languages, he dealt with the problems of the meaning of a statement, the different interpretations of probability, the nature of explanation, and the distinctions between analytic and synthetic, a priori and a posteriori, and necessary and contingent statements.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. The Structure of Scientific Theories
  3. Analytic and Synthetic
  4. Meaning and Verifiability
  5. Probability and Inductive Logic
  6. Modal Logic and the Philosophy of Language
  7. Philosophy of Physics
  8. Carnap's Heritage
  9. References and Further Reading
    1. Carnap's Works
    2. Other Sources

1. Life

Rudolf Carnap was born on May 18, 1891, in Ronsdorf, Germany. In 1898, after his father's death, his family moved to Barmen, where Carnap studied at the Gymnasium. From 1910 to1914 he studied philosophy, physics and mathematics at the universities of Jena and Freiburg. He studied Kant under Bruno Bauch and later recalled how a whole year was devoted to the discussion of The Critique of Pure Reason. Carnap became especially interested in Kant’s theory of space. Carnap took three courses from Gottlob Frege in 1910, 1913 and 1914. Frege was professor of mathematics at Jena. During those courses, Frege expounded his system of logic and its applications in mathematics. However, Carnap’s principal interest at that time was in physics, and by 1913 he was planning to write his dissertation on thermionic emission. His studies were interrupted by World War I and Carnap served at the front until 1917. He then moved to Berlin and studied the theory of relativity. At that time, Albert Einstein was professor of physics at the University of Berlin.

After the war, Carnap developed a new dissertation, this time on an axiomatic system for the physical theory of space and time. He submitted a draft to physicist Max Wien, director of the Institute of Physics at the University of Jena, and to Bruno Bauch. Both found the work interesting, but Wien told Carnap the dissertation was pertinent to philosophy, not to physics, while Bauch said it was relevant to physics. Carnap then chose to write a dissertation under the direction of Bauch on the theory of space from a philosophical point of view. Entitled Der Raum (Space), the work was clearly influenced by Kantian philosophy. Submitted in 1921, it was published the following year in a supplemental issue of Kant-Studien.

Carnap's involvement with the Vienna Circle developed over the next few years. He met Hans Reichenbach at a conference on philosophy held at Erlangen in 1923. Reichenbach introduced him to Moritz Schlick, then professor of the theory of inductive science at Vienna. Carnap visited Schlick - and the Vienna Circle - in 1925 and the following year moved to Vienna to become assistant professor at the University of Vienna. He became a leading member of the Vienna Circle and, in 1929, with Hans Hahn and Otto Neurath, he wrote the manifesto of the Circle.

In 1928, Carnap published The Logical Structure of the World, in which he developed a formal version of empiricism arguing that all scientific terms are definable by means of a phenomenalistic language. The great merit of the book was the rigor with which Carnap developed his theory. In the same year he published Pseudoproblems in Philosophy asserting the meaninglessness of many philosophical problems. He was closely involved in the First Conference on Epistemology, held in Prague in 1929 and organized by the Vienna Circle and the Berlin Circle (the latter founded by Reichenbach in 1928). The following year, he and Reichenbach founded the journal Erkenntnis. At the same time, Carnap met Alfred Tarski, who was developing his semantical theory of truth. Carnap was also interested in mathematical logic and wrote a manual of logic, entitled Abriss der Logistik (1929).

In 1931, Carnap moved to Prague to become professor of natural philosophy at the German University. It was there that he made his important contribution to logic with The Logical Syntax of Language (1934). His stay in Prague, however, was cut short by the Nazi rise to power. In 1935, with the aid of the American philosophers Charles Morris and Willard Van Orman Quine, whom he had met in Prague the previous year, Carnap moved to the United States. He became an American citizen in 1941.

From 1936 to1952, Carnap was a professor at the University of Chicago (with the year 1940-41 spent as a visiting professor at Harvard University). He then spent two years at the Institute for Advanced Study at Princeton before taking an appointment at the University of California at Los Angeles.

In the 1940s, stimulated by Tarskian model theory, Carnap became interested in semantics. He wrote several books on semantics: Introduction to Semantics (1942), Formalization of Logic (1943), and Meaning and Necessity: A Study in Semantics and Modal Logic (1947). In Meaning and Necessity, Carnap used semantics to explain modalities. Subsequently he began to work on the structure of scientific theories. His main concerns were (i) to give an account of the distinction between analytic and synthetic statements and (ii) to give a suitable formulation of the verifiability principle; that is, to find a criterion of significance appropriate to scientific language. Other important works were "Meaning Postulates" (1952) and "Observation Language and Theoretical Language" (1958). The latter sets out Carnap's definitive view on the analytic-synthetic distinction. "The Methodological Character of Theoretical Concepts" (1958) is an attempt to give a tentative definition of a criterion of significance for scientific language. Carnap was also interested in formal logic (Introduction to Symbolic Logic, 1954) and in inductive logic (Logical Foundations of Probability, 1950; The Continuum of Inductive Methods, 1952). The Philosophy of Rudolf Carnap, ed. by Paul Arthur Schilpp, was published in 1963 and includes an intellectual autobiography. Philosophical Foundations of Physics, ed. by Martin Gardner, was published in 1966. Carnap was working on the theory of inductive logic when he died on September 14, 1970, at Santa Monica, California.

2. The Structure of Scientific Theories

In Carnap's opinion, a scientific theory is an interpreted axiomatic formal system. It consists of:

  • a formal language, including logical and non-logical terms;
  • a set of logical-mathematical axioms and rules of inference;
  • a set of non-logical axioms, expressing the empirical portion of the theory;
  • a set of meaning postulates stating the meaning of non-logical terms, which formalize the analytic truths of the theory;
  • a set of rules of correspondence, which give an empirical interpretation of the theory.

The sets of meaning postulates and rules of correspondence may be included in the set of non-logical axioms. Indeed, meaning postulates and rules of correspondence are not usually explicitly distinguished from non-logical axioms; only one set of axioms is formulated. One of the main purposes of the philosophy of science is to show the difference between the various kinds of statements.

The Language of Scientific Theories The language of a scientific theory consists of:

  1. a set of symbols and
  2. rules to ensure that a sequence of symbols is a well-formed formula, that is, correct with respect to syntax.

Among the symbols of the language are logical and non-logical terms. The set of logical terms include logical symbols, e.g., connectives and quantifiers, and mathematical symbols, e.g., numbers, derivatives, and integrals. Non-logical terms are divided into observational and theoretical. They are symbols denoting physical entities, properties or relations such as 'blue', 'cold', ' warmer than', 'proton', 'electromagnetic field'. Formulas are divided into: (i) logical statements, which do not contain non-logical terms; (ii) observational statements, which contain observational terms but no theoretical terms; (iii) purely theoretical statements, which contain theoretical terms but no observational terms and (iv) rules of correspondence, which contain both observational and theoretical terms.

Classification of statements in a scientific language
type of statement
observational terms
theoretical terms
logical statements No No
observational statements Yes No
purely theoretical statements No Yes
rules of correspondence Yes Yes

Observational language contains only logical and observational statements; theoretical language contains logical and theoretical statements and rules of correspondence.

The distinction between observational and theoretical terms is a central tenet of logical positivism and at the core of Carnap's view on scientific theories. In his book Philosophical Foundations of Physics (1966), Carnap bases the distinction between observational and theoretical terms on the distinction between two kinds of scientific laws, namely empirical laws and theoretical laws.

An empirical law deals with objects or properties that can be observed or measured by means of simple procedures. This kind of law can be directly confirmed by empirical observations. It can explain and forecast facts and be thought of as an inductive generalization of such factual observations. Typically, an empirical law which deals with measurable physical quantities, can be established by means of measuring such quantities in suitable cases and then interpolating a simple curve between the measured values. For example, a physicist could measure the volume V, the temperature T and the pressure P of a gas in diverse experiments, and he could find the law PV=RT, for a suitable constant R.

A theoretical law, on the other hand, is concerned with objects or properties we cannot observe or measure but only infer from direct observations. A theoretical law cannot be justified by means of direct observation. It is not an inductive generalization but a hypothesis reaching beyond experience. While an empirical law can explain and forecast facts, a theoretical law can explain and forecast empirical laws. The method of justifying a theoretical law is indirect: a scientist does not test the law itself but, rather, the empirical laws that are among its consequences.

The distinction between empirical and theoretical laws entails the distinction between observational and theoretical properties, and hence between observational and theoretical terms. The distinction in many situations is clear, for example: the laws that deal with the pressure, volume and temperature of a gas are empirical laws and the corresponding terms are observational; while the laws of quantum mechanics are theoretical. Carnap admits, however, that the distinction is not always clear and the line of demarcation often arbitrary. In some ways the distinction between observational and theoretical terms is similar to that between macro-events, which are characterized by physical quantities that remain constant over a large portion of space and time, and micro-events, where physical quantities change rapidly in space or time.

3. Analytic and Synthetic

To the logical empiricist, all statements can be divided into two classes: analytic a priori and synthetic a posteriori. There can be no synthetic a priori statements. A substantial aspect of Carnap's work was his attempt to give precise definition to the distinction between analytic and synthetic statements.

In The Logical Syntax of Language (1934), Carnap studied a formal language that could express classical mathematics and scientific theories, for example, classical physics. Carnap would have known Kurt Gödel’s 1931 article on the incompleteness of mathematics. He was, therefore, aware of the substantial difference between the two concepts of proof and consequence: some statements, despite being a logical consequence of the axioms of mathematics, are not provable by means of these axioms. He would not, however, have been able to take account of Alfred Tarski’s essay on semantics, first published in Polish in 1933. Tarski’s essay led to the notion of logical consequence being regarded as a semantic concept and defined by means of model theory. These circumstances explain how Carnap, in The Logical Syntax of Language, gave a purely syntactic formulation of the concept of logical consequence. However, he did define a new rule of inference, now called the omega-rule, but formerly called the Carnap rule:

From the infinite series of premises A(1), A(2), ... , A(n), A(n+1) ,..., we can infer the conclusion (x)A(x)

Carnap defines the notion of logical consequence in the following way: a statement A is a logical consequence of a set S of statements if and only if there is a proof of A based on the set S; it is admissible to use the omega-rule in the proof of A. In the definition of the notion of provable, however, a statement A is provable by means of a set S of statements if and only if there is a proof of A based on the set S, but the omega-rule is not admissible in the proof of A. (A formal system which admits the use of the omega-rule is complete, so Gödel's incompleteness theorem does not apply to such formal systems.

Carnap then proceeded to define some kinds of statements: (i) a statement is L-true if and only if it is a logical consequence of the empty set of statements; (ii) a statement is L-false if and only if all statements are a logical consequence of it; (iii) a statement is analytic if and only if it is L-true or L-false; (iv) a statement is synthetic if and only if is not analytic. Carnap thus defines analytic statements as logically determined statements: their truth depends on logical rules of inference and is independent of experience. Thus, analytic statements are a priori while synthetic statements are a posteriori, because they are not logically determined.

Carnap maintained his definitions of statements in his article “Testability and Meaning” (1936) and his book Meaning and Necessity (1947). In “Testability and Meaning,” he introduced semantic concepts: a statement is analytic if and only if it is logically true; it is self-contradictory if and only if it is logically false. In any other case, the statement is synthetic. In Meaning and Necessity. Carnap first defines the notion of L-true (a statement is L-true if its truth depends on semantic rules) and then defines the notion of L-false (a statements if L-false if its negation is L-true). A statement is L-determined if it is L-true or L-false; analytic statements are L-determined, while synthetic statements are not L-determined. This is very similar to the definitions Carnap gave in The Logical Syntax of Language but with the change from syntactic to semantic concepts.

In 1951, Quine published the article "Two Dogmas of Empiricism," in which he disputed the distinction made between analytic and synthetic statements. In response, Carnap partially changed his point of view on this problem. His first response to Quine came in "Meaning postulates" (1952) where Carnap suggested that analytic statements are those which can be derived from a set of appropriate sentences that he called meaning postulates. Such sentences define the meaning of non logical terms and thus the set of analytic statements is not equal to the set of logically true statements. Later, in "Observation language and theoretical language" (1958), he expressed a general method for determining a set of meaning postulates for the language of a scientific theory. He further expounded on this method in his reply to Carl Gustav Hempel in The Philosophy of Rudolf Carnap (1963), and in Philosophical Foundations of Physics (1966). Suppose the number of non-logical axioms is finite. Let T be the conjunction of all purely theoretical axioms, and C the conjunction of all correspondence postulates and TC the conjunction of T and C. The theory is equivalent to the single axiom TC. Carnap formulates the following problems: how can we find two statements, say A and R, so that A expresses the analytic portion of the theory (that is, all consequences of A are analytic) while R expresses the empirical portion (that is, all consequences of R are synthetic)? The empirical content of the theory is formulated by means of a Ramsey sentence (a discovery of the English philosopher Frank Ramsey). Carnap’s solution to the problem builds a Ramsey sentence on the following instructions:

  1. Replace every theoretical term in TC with a variable.
  2. Add an appropriate number of existential quantifiers at the beginning of the sentence.

Look at the following example. Let TC(O 1 ,..,O n ,T 1 ,...,T m ) be the conjunction of T and C; in TC there are observational terms O 1 ...O n and theoretical terms T 1 ...T m . The Ramsey sentence (R) is

EX 1 ...EX m TC(O 1 ,...,O n ,X 1 ,...,X m )

Every observational statement which is derivable from TC is also derivable from R and vice versa so that, R expresses exactly the empirical portion of the theory. Carnap proposes the statement R TC as the only meaning postulate; this became known as the Carnap sentence. Note that every empirical statement that can be derived from the Carnap sentence is logically true, and thus the Carnap sentence lacks empirical consequences. So, a statement is analytic if it is derivable from the Carnap sentence; otherwise the statement is synthetic. The requirements of Carnap's method can be summarized as follows : (i) non-logical axioms must be explicitly stated, (ii) the number of non-logical axioms must be finite and (iii) observational terms must be clearly distinguished from theoretical terms.

4. Meaning and Verifiability

Perhaps the most famous tenet of logical empiricism is the verifiability principle, according to which a synthetic statement is meaningful only if it is verifiable. Carnap sought to give a logical formulation of this principle. In The Logical Structure of the World (1928) he asserted that a statement is meaningful only if every non-logical term is explicitly definable by means of a very restricted phenomenalistic language. A few years later, Carnap realized that this thesis was untenable because a phenomenalistic language is insufficient to define physical concepts. Thus he choose an objective language ("thing language") as the basic language, one in which every primitive term is a physical term. All other terms (biological, psychological, cultural) must be defined by means of basic terms. To overcome the problem that an explicit definition is often impossible, Carnap used dispositional concepts, which can be introduced by means of reduction sentences. For example, if A, B, C and D are observational terms and Q is a dispositional concept, then

(x)[Ax → (Bx ↔ Qx)]
(x)[Cx → (Dx ↔ ~Qx)]

are reduction sentences for Q. In “Testability and Meaning” (1936) Carnap revised the new verifiability principle in this way: all terms must be reducible, by means of definitions or reduction sentences, to the observational language. But this proved to be inadequate. K. R. Popper showed not only that some metaphysical terms can be reduced to the observational language and thus fulfill Carnap's requirements, but also that some genuine physical concepts are forbidden. Carnap acknowledged that criticism and in "The Methodological Character of Theoretical Concepts" (1956) sought to develop a further definition. The main philosophical properties of Carnap's new principle can be outlined under three headings. First, of all, the significance of a term becomes a relative concept: a term is meaningful with respect to a given theory and a given language. The meaning of a concept thus depends on the theory in which that concept is used. This represents a significant modification in empiricism's theory of meaning. Secondly, Carnap explicitly acknowledges that some theoretical terms cannot be reduced to the observational language: they acquire an empirical meaning by means of the links with other reducible theoretical terms. Third, Carnap realizes that the principle of operationalism is too restrictive. Operationalism was formulated by the American physicist Percy Williams Bridgman (1882-1961) in his book The Logic of Modern Physics (1927). According to Bridgman, every physical concept is defined by the operations a physicist uses to apply it. Bridgman asserted that the curvature of space-time, a concept used by Einstein in his general theory of relativity, is meaningless, because it is not definable by means of operations., Bridgman subsequently changed his philosophical point of view, and admitted there is an indirect connection with observations. Perhaps influenced by Popper's criticism, or by the problematic consequences of a strict operationalism, Carnap changed his earlier point of view and freely admitted a very indirect connection between theoretical terms and the observational language.

5. Probability and Inductive Logic

A variety of interpretations of probability have been proposed:

  • Classical interpretation. The probability of an event is the ratio of the favorable outcomes to the possible outcomes. For example: a die is thrown with the result that "the score is five". There are six possible outcomes with only one favorable; thus the probability of "the score is five" is one sixth.
  • Axiomatic interpretation. The probability is whatever fulfils the axioms of the theory of probability. In the early 1930s, the Russian mathematician Andrei Nikolaevich Kolmogorov (1903-1987) formulated the first axiomatic system for probability.
  • Frequency interpretation, now the favored interpretation in empirical science. The probability of an event in a sequence of events is the limit of the relative frequency of that event. Example: throw a die several times and record the scores; the relative frequency of "the score is five" is about one sixth; the limit of the relative frequency is exactly one sixth.
  • Probability as a degree of confirmation. This was an approach supported by Carnap and students of inductive logic. The probability of a statement is the degree of confirmation the empirical evidence gives to the statement. Example: the statement "the score is five" receives a partial confirmation by the evidence; its degree of confirmation is one sixth.
  • Subjective interpretation. The probability is a measure of the degree of belief. A special case is the theory that the probability is a fair betting quotient - this interpretation was supported by Carnap. Example: suppose you bet that the score would be five; you bet a dollar and, if you win, you will receive six dollars: this is a fair bet.
  • Propensity interpretation. This is a proposal of K. R. Popper. The probability of an event is an objective property of the event. For example: the physical properties of a die (the die is homogeneous; it has six sides; on every side there is a different number between one and six; etc.) explain the fact that the limit of the relative frequency of "the score is five" is one sixth.

Carnap devoted himself to giving an account of the probability as a degree of confirmation. The philosophically most significant consequences of his research arise from his assertion that the probability of a statement, with respect to a given body of evidence, is a logical relation between the statement and the evidence. Thus it is necessary to build an inductive logic; that is, a logic which studies the logical relations between statements and evidence. Inductive logic would give us a mathematical method of evaluating the reliability of an hypothesis. In this way inductive logic would answer the problem raised by David Hume's analysis of induction. Of course, we cannot be sure that an hypothesis is true; but we can evaluate its degree of confirmation and we can thus compare alternative theories.

In spite of the abundance of logical and mathematical methods Carnap used in his own research on the inductive logic, he was not able to formulate a theory of the inductive confirmation of scientific laws. In fact, in Carnap's inductive logic, the degree of confirmation of every universal law is always zero.

Carnap tried to employ the physical-mathematical theory of thermodynamic entropy to develop a comprehensive theory of inductive logic, but his plan never progressed beyond an outline stage. His works on entropy were published posthumously.

6. Modal Logic and the Philosophy of Language

The following table, which is an adaptation of a similar table Carnap used in Meaning and Necessity, shows the relations between modal properties such as necessary and impossible and logical properties such as L-true, L-false, analytic, synthetic. The symbol N means "necessarily", so that Np means "necessarily p" or “p is necessary.”

Modal and logical properties of statements
Modalities
Formalization
Logical status
p is necessary Np L true, analytic
p is impossible N~p L false, contradictory
p is contingent ~Np & ~N~p factual, synthetic
p is not necessary ~Np Not L true
p is possible ~N~p Not L false
p is not contingent Np v N~p L determined, not synthetic

Carnap identifies the necessity of a statement p with its logical truth: a statement is necessary if and only if it is logically true. Thus modal properties can be defined by means of the usual logical properties of statements. Np, i.e., "necessarily p", is true if and only if p is logically true. He defines the possibility of p as "it is not necessary that not p". That is, "possibly p" is defined as ~N~p. The impossibility of p means that p is logically false. It must be stressed that, in Carnap's opinion, every modal concept is definable by means of the logical properties of statements. Modal concepts are thus explicable from a classical point of view (meaning "using classical logic", e.g., first order logic). Carnap was aware that the symbol N is definable only in the meta-language, not in the object language. Np means "p is logically true", and the last statement belongs to the meta-language; thus N is not explicitly definable in the language of a formal logic, and we cannot eliminate the term N. More precisely, we can define N only by means of another modal symbol we take as a primitive symbol, so that at least one modal symbol is required among the primitive symbols.

Carnap's formulation of modal logic is very important from a historical point of view. Carnap gave the first semantic analysis of a modal logic, using Tarskian model theory to explain the conditions in which "necessarily p" is true. He also solved the problem of the meaning of the statement (x)N[Ax], where Ax is a sentence in which the individual variable x occurs. Carnap showed that (x)N[Ax] is equivalent to N[(x)Ax] or, more precisely, he proved we can assume its equivalence without contradictions.

From a broader philosophical point of view, Carnap believed that modalities did not require a new conceptual framework; a semantic logic of language can explain the modal concepts. The method he used in explaining modalities was a typical example of his philosophical analysis. Another interesting example is the explanation of belief-sentences which Carnap gave in Meaning and Necessity. Carnap asserts that two sentences have the same extension if they are equivalent, i.e., if they are both true or both false. On the other hand, two sentences have the same intension if they are logically equivalent, i.e., their equivalence is due to the semantic rules of the language. Let A be a sentence in which another sentence occurs, say p. A is called "extensional with respect to p" if and only if the truth value of A does not change if we substitute the sentence p with an equivalent sentence q. A is called "intensional with respect to p" if and only if (i) A is not extensional with respect to p and (ii) the truth of A does not change if we substitute the sentence p with a logically equivalent sentence q. The following examples arise from Carnap’s assertions:

  • The sentence A v B is extensional with respect to both A and B; we can substitute A and B with equivalent sentences and the truth value of A v B does not change.
  • Suppose A is true but not L-true; therefore the sentences A v ~A and A are equivalent (both are true) and, of course, they are not L-equivalent. The sentence N(A v ~A) is true and the sentence N(A) is false; thus N(A) is not extensional with respect to A. On the contrary, if C is a sentence L-equivalent to A v ~A, then N(A v ~A) and N(C) are both true: N(A) is intensional with respect to A.

There are sentences which are neither extensional not intensional; for example, belief-sentences. Carnap's example is "John believes that D". Suppose that "John believes that D" is true; let A be a sentence equivalent to D and let B be a sentence L-equivalent to D. It is possible that the sentences "John believes that A" and "John believes that B" are false. In fact, John can believe that a sentence is true, but he can believe that a logically equivalent sentence is false. To explain belief-sentences, Carnap defines the notion of intensional isomorphism. In broad terms, two sentences are intensionally isomorphic if and only if their corresponding elements are L-equivalent. In the belief-sentence "John believes that D" we can substitute D with an intensionally isomorphic sentence C.

7. Philosophy of Physics

The first and the last books Carnap published during his lifetime were concerned with the philosophy of physics: his doctoral dissertation (Der Raum, 1922) and Philosophical Foundations of Physics, ed. by Martin Gardner, 1966. Der Raum deals with the philosophy of space. Carnap recognizes the difference between three kinds of theories of space: formal, physical and intuitive s. Formal space is analytic a priori; it is concerned with the formal properties of the space that is with those properties which are a logical consequence of a definite set of axioms. Physical space is synthetic a posteriori; it is the object of natural science, and we can know its structure only by means of experience. Intuitive space is synthetic a priori, and is known via a priori intuition. According to Carnap, the distinction between three different kinds of space is similar to the distinction between three different aspects of geometry: projective, metric and topological respectively.

Some aspects of Der Raum remain very interesting. First, Carnap accepts a neo-Kantian philosophical point of view. Intuitive space, with its synthetic a priori character, is a concession to Kantian philosophy. Second, Carnap uses the methods of mathematical logic; for example, the characterization of intuitive space is given by means of Hilbert's axioms for topology. Thirdly, the distinction between formal and physical space is similar to the distinction between mathematical and physical geometry. This distinction, first proposed by Hans Reichenbach and later accepted by Carnap, and became the official position of logical empiricism on the philosophy of space.

Carnap also developed a formal system for space-time topology. He asserted (1925) that space relations are based on the causal propagation of a signal, while the causal propagation itself is based on the time order.

Philosophical Foundations of Physics is a clear and approachable survey of topics from the philosophy of physics based on Carnap's university lectures. Some theories expressed there are not those of Carnap alone, but they belong to the common heritage of logical empiricism. The subjects dealt with in the book include:

  • The structure of scientific explanation: deductive and probabilistic explanation.
  • The philosophical and physical significance of non-Euclidean geometry; the theory of space in the general theory of relativity. Carnap argues against Kantian philosophy, especially against the synthetic a priori, and against conventionalism. He gives a clear explanation of the main properties of non-Euclidean geometry.
  • Determinism and quantum physics.
  • The nature of scientific language. Carnap deals with (i) the distinction between observational and theoretical terms, (ii) the distinction between analytic and synthetic statements and (iii) quantitative concepts.

As a sample of the content of Philosophical Foundations of Physics we can briefly look at Carnap's thought on scientific explanation. Carnap accepts the classical theory developed by Carl Gustav Hempel. Carnap gives the following example to explain the general structure of a scientific explanation:

(x)(Px→ Qx)
Pa
---------
Qa

where the first statement is a scientific law; the second, is a description of the initial conditions; and the third, is the description of the event we want to explain. The last statement is a logical consequence of the first and the second, which are the premises of the explanation. A scientific explanation is thus a logical derivation of an appropriate statement from a set of premises, which state universal laws and initial conditions. According to Carnap, there is another kind of scientific explanation, probabilistic explanation, in which at least one universal law is not a deterministic law, but a probabilistic law. Again Carnap’s example is:

fr(Q,P) = 0.8
Pa
----------
Qa

where the first sentence means "the relative frequency of Q with respect to P is 0.8". Qa is not a logical consequence of the premises; therefore this kind of explanation determines only a certain degree of confirmation for the event we want to explain.

8. Carnap's Heritage

Carnap's work has stimulated much debate. A substantial scholarly literature, both critical and supportive, has developed from examination of his thought. With respect to the analytic-synthetic distinction, Ryszard Wojcicki and Marian Przelecki - two Polish logicians - formulated a semantic definition of the distinction between analytic and synthetic. They proved that the Carnap sentence is the weakest meaning postulate, i.e., every meaning postulate entails the Carnap sentence. As a result, the set of analytic statements which are a logical consequence of the Carnap sentence is the smallest set of analytic statements. Wojcicki and Przelecki's research is independent of the distinction between observational and theoretical terms, i.e., their suggested definition also works in a purely theoretical language. They also dispense with the requirement for a finite number of non-logical axioms.

The tentative definition of meaningfulness that Carnap proposed in "The Methodological Character of Theoretical Concepts" has been proved untenable. See, for example, David Kaplan, "Significance and Analyticity" in Rudolf Carnap, Logical Empiricist and Marco Mondadori's introduction to Analiticità, Significanza, Induzione, in which Mondadori suggests a possible correction of Carnap's definition.

With respect to inductive logic, I mention only Jaakko Hintikka's generalization of Carnap's continuum of inductive methods. In Carnap's inductive logic, the probability of every universal law is always zero. Hintikka succeeded in formulating an inductive logic in which universal laws can obtain a positive degree of confirmation.

In Meaning and Necessity, 1947, Carnap was the first logician to use a semantic method to explain modalities. However, he used Tarskian model theory, so that every model of the language is an admissible model. In 1972 the American philosopher Saul Kripke was able to prove that a full semantics of modalities can be attained by means of possible-worlds semantics. According to Kripke, not all possible models are admissible. J. Hintikka's essay "Carnap's heritage in logical semantics" in Rudolf Carnap, Logical Empiricist, shows that Carnap came extremely close to possible-worlds semantics, but was not able to go beyond classical model theory.

The omega-rule, which Carnap proposed in The Logical Syntax of Language, has come into widespread use in metamathematical research over a broad range of subjects.

9. References and Further Reading

The Philosophy of Rudolf Carnap (1963) contains the most complete bibliography of Carnap's work.  Listed below are Carnap's most important works, arranged in chronological order.

a. Carnap's Works

  • 1922 Der Raum: Ein Beitrag zur Wissenschaftslehre, dissertation, in Kant-Studien, Ergänzungshefte, n. 56
  • 1925 "Über die Abhängigkeit der Eigenschaften der Raumes von denen der Zeit" in Kant-Studien, 30
  • 1926 Physikalische Begriffsbildung, Karlsruhe : Braun, (Wissen und Wirken ; 39)
  • 1928 Scheinprobleme in der Philosophie, Berlin : Weltkreis-Verlag
  • 1928 Der Logische Aufbau der Welt, Leipzig : Felix Meiner Verlag (English translation The Logical Structure of the World; Pseudoproblems in Philosophy, Berkeley : University of California Press, 1967)
  • 1929 (with Otto Neurath and Hans Hahn) Wissenschaftliche Weltauffassung der Wiener Kreis, Vienna : A. Wolf
  • 1929 Abriss der Logistik, mit besonderer Berücksichtigung der Relationstheorie und ihrer Anwendungen, Vienna : Springer
  • 1932 "Die physikalische Sprache als Universalsprache der Wissenschaft" in Erkenntnis, II (English translation The Unity of Science, London : Kegan Paul, 1934)
  • 1934 Logische Syntax der Sprache (English translation The Logical Syntax of Language, New York : Humanities, 1937)
  • 1935 Philosophy and Logical Syntax, London : Kegan Paul
  • 1936 "Testability and meaning" in Philosophy of Science, III (1936) and IV (1937)
  • 1938 "Logical Foundations of the Unity of Science" in International Encyclopaedia of Unified Science, vol. I n. 1, Chicago : University of Chicago Press
  • 1939 "Foundations of Logic and Mathematics" in International Encyclopaedia of Unified Science, vol. I n. 3, Chicago : University of Chicago Press
  • 1942 Introduction to Semantics, Cambridge, Mass. : Harvard University Press
  • 1943 Formalization of Logic, Cambridge, Mass. : Harvard University Press
  • 1947 Meaning and Necessity: a Study in Semantics and Modal Logic, Chicago : University of Chicago Press
  • 1950 Logical Foundations of Probability, Chicago : University of Chicago Press
  • 1952 "Meaning postulates" in Philosophical Studies, III (now in Meaning and Necessity, 1956, 2nd edition)
  • 1952 The Continuum of Inductive Methods, Chicago : University of Chicago Press
  • 1954 Einführung in die Symbolische Logik, Vienna : Springer (English translation Introduction to Symbolic Logic and its Applications, New York : Dover, 1958)
  • 1956 "The Methodological Character of Theoretical Concepts" in Minnesota Studies in the Philosophy of Science, vol. I, ed. by H. Feigl and M. Scriven, Minneapolis : University of Minnesota Press
  • 1958 "Beobacthungssprache und theoretische Sprache" in Dialectica, XII (English translation "Observation Language and Theoretical Language" in Rudolf Carnap, Logical Empiricist, Dordrecht, Holl. : D. Reidel Publishing Company, 1975)
  • 1966 Philosophical Foundations of Physics, ed. by Martin Gardner, New York : Basic Books
  • 1977 Two Essays on Entropy, ed. by Abner Shimony, Berkeley : University of California Press

b. Other Sources

  • 1962 Logic and Language: Studies Dedicated to Professor Rudolf Carnap on the Occasion of his Seventieth Birthday, Dordrect, Holl. : D. Reidel Publishing Company
  • 1963 The Philosophy of Rudolf Carnap, ed. by Paul Arthur Schillp, La Salle, Ill. : Open Court Pub. Co.
  • 1970 PSA 1970: Proceedings of the 1970 Biennial Meeting of the Philosophy of Science Association: In Memory of Rudolf Carnap, Dordrect, Holl. : D. Reidel Publishing Company
  • 1971 Analiticità, Significanza, Induzione, ed. by Alberto Meotti e Marco Mondadori, Bologna, Italy : il Mulino
  • 1975 Rudolf Carnap, Logical Empiricist. Materials and Perspectives, ed. by Jaakko Hintikka, Dordrecht, Holl. : D. Reidel Publishing Company
  • 1986 Joëlle Proust, Questions de Forme: Logique at Proposition Analytique de Kant a Carnap, Paris, France: Fayard (English translation Questions of Forms: Logic and Analytic Propositions from Kant to Carnap, Minneapolis : University of Minnesota Press)
  • 1990 Dear Carnap, Dear Van: The Quine-Carnap Correspondence and Related Work, ed. by Richard Creath, Berkeley : University of California Press
  • 1991 Maria Grazia Sandrini, Probabilità e Induzione: Carnap e la Conferma come Concetto Semantico, Milano, Italy : Franco Angeli
  • 1991 Erkenntnis Orientated: A Centennial Volume for Rudolf Carnap and Hans Reichenbach, ed. by Wolfgang Spohn, Dordrecht; Boston : Kluwer Academic Publishers
  • 1991 Logic, Language, and the Structure of Scientific Theories: Proceedings of the Carnap-Reichenbach Centennial, University of Konstanz, 21-24 May 1991 Pittsburgh : University of Pittsburgh Press; [Konstanz] : Universitasverlag Konstanz
  • 1995 L'eredità di Rudolf Carnap: Epistemologia, Filosofia delle Scienze, Filosofia del Linguaggio, ed. by Alberto Pasquinelli, Bologna, Italy : CLUEB

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Mauro Murzi
Email: murzim@yahoo.com
Italy

Cleanthes (331—232 B.C.E.)

Cleanthes was a Stoic philosopher of Assus in Lydia, and a disciple of Zeno of Citium. After the death of Zeno he presided over his school. He was originally a wrestler, and in this capacity he visited Athens, where he became acquainted with philosophy. Although he possessed no more than four drachma, he was determined to put himself under an eminent philosopher. His first master was Crates, the Academic. He afterward became Zeno's disciple and an advocate of his doctrines. By night he drew water as a common laborer in the public gardens so that he would have leisure to attend lectures in the daytime. The Athenian citizens observed that, although he appeared strong and healthy, he had no visible means of subsistence; they then summoned him before the Areopagas, according to the custom of the city, to give an account of his manner of living. He then produced the gardener for whom he drew water, and a woman for whom he ground meal, as witnesses to prove that he lived by the labor of his hands. The judges of the court were struck with such admiration of his conduct, that they ordered ten minae to be paid him out of the public treasury. Zeno, however, did not allow him to accept it. Antigonus afterward presented him with three thousand minae. From the manner in which this philosopher supported himself, he was called "the well drawer." For many years he was so poor that he was compelled to take notes on Zeno's lectures on shells and bones, since he could not afford to buy better materials. He remained, however, a pupil of Zeno for nineteen years.

His natural faculties were slow. But resolution and perseverance enabled him to overcome all difficulties. At last he became so complete a master of Stoicism that he was perfectly qualified to succeed Zeno. His fellow disciples often ridiculed him for his dullness by calling him an ass. However, his answer was, that if he were an ass he was the better able to bear the weight of Zeno's doctrine. He wrote much, but none of his writings remain except a hymn to Zeus. After his death, the Roman senate erected a statue in honor of him at Assus. It is said that he starved himself to death in his 99th year.

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Richard Cumberland (1631—1718)

CumberlandCumberland's best known work is De Legibus Naturae (1672), the title-page of profess to "consider and refute... the elements of Mr. Hobbes's Philosophy, as well Moral as Civil." It puts forward a doctrine of morality which is based on the law of nature, and this is accompanied by a running criticism of Hobbes's views. Cumberland looks upon the law of nature as capable of being inferred from observation of physical and mental phenomena (themselves due to the will of God), and at the same time as pointing out the "action of a rational agent which will chiefly promote the common good."

He attacks the neo-Platonists, and the theory of innate ideas as a Platonic error:

The Platonists, indeed, clear up this Difficulty in an easier manner, by the Supposition of innate ideas, as well of the Laws of Nature themselves, as of those Matters about which they are conservant; but, truly, I have not been so happy as to learn the Laws of Nature in so short a way. Nor seems it to me well advised, to build the Doctrine of natural Religion and Morality upon an Hypothesis, which has been by the generality of Philosophers as well Heathen as Christian, and can never be proved against the Epicureans, with whom is our chief controversy. [Introduction, Sect. 5]

Laws of Nature, in this ethical reference, are defined by him as "propositions of unchangeable Truth, which direct our voluntary Actions about choosing Good and Evil; and impose an Obligation to external actions even without civil Laws, and laying aside all Considerations of those compacts which constitute civil government" (Ch. 1, p. 39).

He defines "Good" as "that which preserves, or enlarges and perfects, the Faculties of any one thing, or of several" (Ch. 2, p. 165). It follows that the Law of Nature prescribes those actions which "will chiefly promote the common Good, and by which only the entire Happiness of particular Persons can be obtained" (Ch. 5, p. 189). He also includes both happiness and perfection, or development of faculty, as inseparable elements in the Good. He is particularly concerned with the determination of the form of conduct which will lead to the attainment of this end; and his conclusion is that the best method of securing it is that of benevolence, or regard for the common good, as opposed to selfish preoccupation with our own individual interests. "The greatest Benevolence of every rational Agent towards all, forms the happiness state of every, and of all the Benevolent, as far as is in their Power; and is necessarily requisite to the happiest State which they can attain, and therefore the common Good is the supreme Law" (Ch. 1). This endeavor to promote the common good "includes our Love of God, and of all Mankind, who are the Parts of this System. God, indeed, is the principal Part; Men the subordinate: A benevolence toward both includes Piety and Humanity, that is, both Tables of the Law of Nature" (Introduction, Sect. 15, p. 20).

He repeatedly points out that the common good includes our own, as one of its parts; but it must be sought only as a part, in subordination to the whole. Cumberland's confidence in the perfect coincidence of virtue, or benevolence, and individual happiness ultimately depends upon his doctrine of the divine sanctions of the Laws of Nature. But his main interest in the ethical question is to insist, against Hobbes, upon the "naturalness" of the law of benevolence and the inherent unreasonableness of separating the individual and his good from the system of rational beings of which he is in reality only a part, and with whose good his own is inseparably bound up. Thus, he thinks that the "rules of life" are as plain as the "art of numbering," and the following propositions are laid down as necessarily true: (1) "that the good of all rational beings is greater than the like good of any part of that aggregate body, that is, that it is truly the greatest good"; (2) "that in promoting the good of this whole aggregate, the good of individuals is contained and promoted"; and (3) "that the good of every particular part requires the introducing and settling of distinct property in such things, and such services of rational agents, as contribute to the common happiness."

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Cesare Beccaria (1738—1794)

beccaria

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. On Crimes and Punishment
  3. Against Capital Punishment

1. Life

Cesare Beccaria (1738-1794) was born the eldest son in an aristocratic family and educated at a Jesuit school. In his mid-twenties, Beccaria became close friends with Pietro and Alessandro Verri, two brothers who formed an intellectual circle called "the academy of fists" which focused on reforming the criminal justice system. Through this group Beccaria became acquainted with French and British political philosophers, such as Hobbes, Hume, Diderot, Helvetius, Montesquieu, and Hume. At the encouragement of Pietro, Beccaria wrote On Crimes and Punishments (1764). Some background information was provided by Pietro, who was in the process of authoring a text on the history of torture, and Alessandro was an official at a Milan prison had first hand experience of the prison's appalling conditions. The brief work relentlessly protests against torture to obtain confessions, secret accusations, the arbitrary discretionary power of judges, the inconsistency and inequality of sentencing, using personal connections to get a lighter sentence, and the use of capital punishment for serious and even minor offenses. Almost immediately, the work was translated into French and English and went through several editions. Philosophers of the time hailed it, and several European emperors vowed to follow it. With great hesitation, Beccaria acted on an invitation to Paris to meet the great thinkers of the day. A chronically shy person, Beccaria made a poor impression at Paris and returned to Milan after three weeks. Beccaria continued to gain official recognition and held several nominal political positions in Italy. Separated from the invaluable input from his friends, though, he failed to produce another text of equal importance. Outside Italy, an unfounded myth grew that Beccaria's literary silence owed to Austrian restrictions on free expression in Italy.

2. On Crimes and Punishment

Editions of Beccaria's text follow two distinct arrangements of the material: that by Beccaria himself, and that by French translator Andre Morellet (1765) who imposed a more systematic order to Beccaria's original text. Beccaria opens his work describing the great need for reform in the criminal justice system, and he observes how few studies there are on the subject of such reform. Throughout his work, Beccaria develops his position by appealing to two key philosophical theories: social contract and utility. Concerning the social contract, Beccaria argues that punishment is justified only to defend the social contract and to ensure that everyone will be motivated to abide by it. Concerning utility (perhaps influenced by Helvetius), Beccaria argues that the method of punishment selected should be that which serves the greatest public good.

Contemporary political philosophers distinguish between two principle theories of justifying punishment. First, the retributive approach maintains that punishment should be equal to the harm done, either literally an eye for an eye, or more figuratively which allows for alternative forms of compensation. The retributive approach tends to be retaliatory and vengeance-oriented. The second approach is utilitarian which maintains that punishment should increase the total amount of happiness in the world. This often involves punishment as a means of reforming the criminal, incapacitating him from repeating his crime, and deterring others. Beccaria clearly takes a utilitarian stance. For Beccaria, the purpose of punishment is to create a better society, not revenge. Punishment serves to deter others from committing crimes, and to prevent the criminal from repeating his crime.

Beccaria argues that Punishment should be swift since this has the greatest deterrence value. He defends his view about the swiftness of punishment by appealing to the theory of the association of ideas (developed most notably by David Hume and David Hartley). According to associationists, if we know the rules by which the mind connects together two different ideas (such as the ideas of crime and punishment), then we can strengthen their association. For Beccaria when a punishment quickly follows a crime, then the two ideas of "crime" and "punishment" will be more quickly associated in a person's mind. Also, the link between a crime and a punishment is stronger if the punishment is somehow related to the crime. Given the fact that the swiftness of punishment has the greatest impact on deterring others, Beccaria argues that there is no justification for severe punishments. In time we will naturally grow accustomed to increases in severity of punishment, and, thus, the initial increase in severity will lose its effect. There are limits both to how much torment we can endure, and also how much we can inflict.

Beccaria touches on an array of criminal justice practices, recommending reform. For example, he argues that dueling can be eliminated if laws protected a person from insults to his honor. Laws against suicide are ineffective, and thus should be eliminated, leaving punishment of suicide to God. Bounty hunting should not be permitted since it incites people to be immoral and shows a weakness in the government. He argues that laws should be clear in defining crimes so that judges do not interpret the law, but only decide whether a law has been broken. Punishments should be in degree to the severity of the crime. Treason is the worst crime since it harms the social contract. This is followed by violence against a person or his property, and, finally, by public disruption. Crimes against property should be punished by fines. The best ways to prevent crimes are to enact clear and simple laws, reward virtue, and improve education.

3. Against Capital Punishment

In On Crimes and Punishments Beccaria presents one of the first sustained critiques of the use of capital punishment. Briefly, his position is that capital punishment is not necessary to deter, and long term imprisonment is a more powerful deterrent since execution is transient. He starts by describing the connection between the social contract and our right to life. Locke argued that people forfeit their right to life when they initiate a state of war with other people. Beccaria disagrees. Following Hobbes, Beccaria believes that, in the social contract, we negotiate away only the minimal number of rights necessary to bring about peace. Thus, people hold onto their right to life, and do not hand this over to the public good. Given the fact that capital punishment cannot be justified by Locke's reasoning, Beccaria argues that the only other justification is that it is either necessary or useful for public good. He contests both of these claims. For Beccaria, history shows that capital punishment fails to deter determined criminals. What we know about human nature also suggests that it has minimal deterrence value. A steady example over a long period of time is more effective in creating moral habits than is a single shocking example of an execution. Beccaria argues that perpetual slavery is a more effective deterrent than capital punishment. Since we should choose the least severe punishment which accomplishes our purpose (that is, deterrence), then perpetual slavery is the preferred mode of punishment for the worst crimes. From the spectator's perspective, observing perpetual slavery will have a more lasting impression than capital punishment. Perpetual slavery will also seem more terrible from the vantage of the spectator, than from the criminal himself. Beccaria explains the psychology of the criminal who wishes to return to the state of nature in view of the gross inequity between the rich and the poor. Again, perpetual slavery is the best deterrence against this motivation. Beccaria argues further that the death penalty in fact has bad effects on society by reducing their sensitivity to human suffering. Potential criminals see it as one more method of perpetuating tyranny. Although capital punishment is practiced in most countries, it is still an error which in time will become rare. He urges rulers to adopt his stance against capital punishment, and predicts that this will give them a lasting fame as peacemakers.

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Active Powers

In 18th and 19th century Scottish common sense philosophy, the term "active powers" refers to the capacities of impulse and desire which lead to or determine human action. It is distinguished from intellectual powers which involve the capacities of reasoning, judging and conceiving.

The distinction is derived from Aristotle's analysis of the capacities or powers of living beings into nutrition, appetite, perception, movement, and reason. Of these, reason is held to be peculiar to humans. However, in humans, appetite (including desire, sensuous impulse, and will) partakes of reason in the sense of being able to obey it. For Aristotle, the distinction between moral and intellectual virtues rests on the distinction between appetitive and purely rational functions of humans. Aristotle's fivefold distinction of powers was adopted by Aquinas, but he discussed in detail only the intellectual and appetitive powers - the latter including desire and will.

Thomas Reid gave currency to this dual division in the late 18th century, especially in his two books Essays on the Intellectual Powers of Man (1785) and Essays on the Active Powers of Man(1788). Under the heading of "active powers" Reid further distinguished the will from principles of action, the latter of which included (1) mechanical principles of instinct and habit, (2) animal principles such as appetite and desire, (3) and rational principles such as duty and rectitude.

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Plato: The Academy

greek_vasePhilosophical institution founded by Plato, which advocated skepticism in succeeding generations.

The Academy (Academia) was originally a public garden or grove in the suburbs of Athens, about six stadia from the city, named from Academus or Hecademus, who left it to the citizens for gymnastics (Paus. i. 29). It was surrounded with a wall by Hipparchus, adorned with statues, temples, and sepulchres of illustrious men; planted with olive and plane trees, and watered by the Cephisus. The olive-trees, according to Athenian fables, were reared from layers taken from the sacred olive in the Erechtheum, and afforded the oil given as a prize to victors at the Panathenean festival. The Academy suffered severely during the siege of Athens by Sylla, many trees being cut down to supply timber for machines of war.Few retreats could be more favorable to philosophy and the Muses. Within this enclosure Plato possessed, as part of his patrimony, a small garden, in which he opened a school for the reception of those inclined to attend his instructions. Hence arose the Academic sect, and hence the term Academy has descended to our times. The nameAcademia is frequently used in philosophical writings, especially in Cicero, as indicative of the Academic sect.

Sextus Empiricus enumerates five divisions of the followers of Plato. He makes Plato founder of the first Academy, Aresilaus of the second, Carneades of the third, Philo and Charmides of the fourth, Antiochus of the fifth. Cicero recognizes only two Academies, the Old and the New, and makes the latter commence as above with Arcesilaus. In enumerating those of the old Academy, he begins, not with Plato, but Democritus, and gives them in the following order: Democritus, Anaxagoras, Empedocles, Parmenides, Xenophanes, Socrates, Plato, Speusippus, Xenocrates, Polemo, Crates, and Crantor. In the New, or Younger, he mentions Arcesilaus, Lacydes, Evander, Hegesinus, Carneades, Clitomachus, and Philo (Acad. Quaest. iv. 5). If we follow the distinction laid down by Diogenes, and alluded to above, the Old Academy will consist of those followers of Plato who taught the doctrine of their master without mixture or corruption; the Middle will embrace those who, by certain innovations in the manner of philosophizing, in some measure receded from the Platonic system without entirely deserting it; while the New will begin with those who relinquished the more questionable tenets of Arcesilaus, and restored, in come measure, the declining reputation of the Platonic school.

Views of the New Academy. The New Academy begins with Carnades (i.e. the Third Academy for Diogenes) and was largely skeptical in its teachings. They denied the possibility of aiming at absolute truth or at any certain criterion of truth. Carneades argued that if there were any such criterion it must exist in reason or sensation or conception; but as reason depends on conception and this in turn on sensation, and as we have no means of deciding whether our sensations really correspond to the objects that produce them, the basis of all knowledge is always uncertain. Hence, all that we can attain to is a high degree of probability, which we must accept as the nearest possible approximation to the truth. The New Academy teaching represents the spirit of an age when religion was decaying, and philosophy itself, losing its earnest and serious spirit, was becoming merely a vehicle for rhetoric and dialectical ingenuity. Cicero's speculative philosophy was in the main in accord with the teachings of Carneades, looking rather to the probable (illud probabile) than to certain truth (see his Academica).

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