Category Archives: Philosophers

Margaret Cavendish (1623—1673)

Margaret Lucas Cavendish, the Duchess of Newcastle, was a philosopher, poet, playwright and essayist. Her philosophical writings were concerned mostly with issues of metaphysics and natural philosophy, but also extended to social and political concerns. Like Hobbes and Descartes, she rejected what she took to be the occult explanations of the Scholastics. Against Descartes, however, she rejected dualism and incorporeal substance of any kind. Against Hobbes, on the other hand, she argued for a vitalist materialism, according to which all things in nature were composed of self-moving, animate matter. Specifically, she argued that the variety and orderliness of natural phenomena cannot be explained by blind mechanism and atomism, but instead require the parts of nature to move themselves in regular ways, according to their distinctive motions. And in order to explain that, she argued for panpsychism, the view that all things in nature possess minds or mental properties. Indeed, she even argued that all bodies, including tables and chairs, as well as parts of the bodies of organisms, such as the human heart or liver, know their own distinctive motions and are thereby able to carry it out. These different parts of nature, each knowing and executing their distinctive motions, create and explain the harmonious and varied order of it. In several ways, Cavendish can be seen as one of the first philosophers to take up several interesting positions against the mechanism of the modern scientific worldview of her time. Thus it is possible to add that she presages thinkers such as Spinoza and Leibniz.

When she turned to discuss political and social issues, Cavendish’s metaphysical commitments seem to remain. Cavendish was a staunch royalist and aristocrat; perhaps not surprisingly, then, she argued that each person in society has a particular place and distinctive activity and that, furthermore, social harmony only arises when people know their proper places and perform their defining actions. She was therefore critical of social mobility and unfettered political liberty, seeing them as a threat to the order and harmony of the state. Even so, her writings also contain nuanced and complex discussions of gender and religion, among a variety of other topics.

Despite her conservative political tendencies, Cavendish herself can be seen as a model for later women writers. She wrote dozens of books, at least five of which alone were on natural philosophy, under her own name, a feat which may make her the most published female author of the seventeenth century and one of the most prolific women philosophers in the early modern period. In addition to writing much on natural philosophy, she wrote on a dizzying array of other topics and, perhaps most impressively, in a wide range of genres. Her philosophically informed poetry, plays, letters and essays are at times as philosophically valuable as her treatises of natural philosophy.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Works
  2. Natural Philosophy
    1. Materialism
    2. Vitalism and the Variability Argument
    3. Panpsychism
    4. God
  3. Political Philosophy
    1. Religious Liberty
    2. Royalism and Aristocracy
    3. Gender
  4. References and Further Reading
    1. Cavendish’s Works in the 17th Century
    2. Modern Editions of Her Works
    3. Secondary Literature

1. Life and Works

Margaret Lucas was born in 1623 in Colchester into a family of aristocrats and staunch royalists. She received little formal education, being tutored at home with her seven siblings, of which she was the youngest. She reports having spent much time in conversation with one of her brothers, John, who considered himself a scholar and who would become a founding member of the Royal Society. She joined the Queen’s court and served as a maid to Queen Henrietta Maria, following her into exile in 1644, during the English Civil War. While in exile she met William Cavendish, then Marquess and later Duke of Newcastle. They were married in 1645.

While in exile in Paris and Antwerp, she reports discussing philosophy and natural science with her husband and his younger brother, Sir Charles Cavendish, who held a regular salon attended by Thomas Hobbes, Kenelm Digby and occasionally René Descartes, Marin Mersenne and Pierre Gassendi. Margaret herself reports having attended several dinners, at which these philosophers were present, though she denies having spoken to them about any, but the most superficial of matters.

While her husband remained in exile, she returned in 1651 and again in 1653 to England. This was during the reign of Commonwealth, during which her husband, were he to have returned, would have had to renounce his royalism and swear fealty to the Commonwealth, as was required by the republican parliament of the time. The parliament did not extend that requirement to women, claiming that women were not capable of such political acts. Thus Margaret was allowed to return to England without swearing fealty to the Commonwealth.

During her 1653 visit, she arranged for the publication of her first collection of writings, Poems and Fancies and Philosophical Fancies. She reports having delivered the second philosophical treatise a few days too late to have it included with the first in a single publication, which had been her original intention. The publisher was Martin and Allestyre, at the Bell in St. Paul’s Churchyard, which was a well-regarded publisher, who later became the official publisher for the Royal Society. It is truly remarkable that she was able to secure their publication, as few women published philosophy in England in the seventeenth century, much less under their own name and while in exile.

The same publishing house would publish The World’s Olio and Philosophical and Physical Opinions in 1655 and Nature’s Pictures in 1656. The second work of 1655, Philosophical and Physical Opinions, contained five parts and 210 chapters, the first part of which, consisting of 58 chapters, was in fact a reprinting of her earlier Philosophical Fancies. With her 1655 Philosophical and Physical Opinions, she added a number of epistles and her “Condemning Treatise on Atoms” to the front matter and also extended the work beyond the earlier Philosophical Fancies significantly.

With the Restoration of Charles II to the throne, she returned to England with her husband and continued to write. In addition to publishing on natural philosophy, she also wrote essays on a remarkable variety of other topics, including the nature of poetry, the proper way to hold a feast, fame, women’s roles in society and many others. She also wrote many plays and poems, as well as a fantastic utopia, The Description of a New World, Called the Blazing World in 1668.

There may have been some controversy over a woman publishing works on natural philosophy, as she felt the need to include several epistles, both from herself and from her husband and brother-in-law, attesting to the fact that she had written these works herself. Indeed, she returns to defend herself as an author and natural philosopher at a number of different places in her work, often in epistles to the reader. She also defends the propriety of her being so bold as to write in her own name and to think her thoughts worthy of publication. Her several discussions of fame are worth noting in this context.

She continued to write on natural philosophy, among other topics, to growing attention. She sent her works to many of the well-known philosophers then operating in England, as well as to the faculties at Cambridge and Oxford.  Indeed, after she had published her most famous work of natural philosophy, Observations Upon Experimental Philosophy in 1666, she was invited to attend a meeting of the Royal Society, a privilege rarely granted to women at the time.

In all, she may be the most prolific woman writer of early modern Europe and certainly the most prolific woman philosopher. Depending on how one counts, she published over a dozen and perhaps as many as twenty works, at least five of which are works on natural philosophy and many more contain essays with substantive philosophical content.

2. Natural Philosophy

Cavendish wrote half a dozen of works on natural philosophy. Indeed, natural philosophy constituted the largest part of her philosophical output and a large part of her writing as a whole. Her philosophical commitments can be described as materialist, vitalist and panpsychist. In what follows, her philosophical discussions will be grouped around several recurring themes and arguments.

a. Materialism

Like Hobbes, Descartes or Bacon, Cavendish regularly motivates her position by attacking the Aristotelianism of the schools, mocking those whom her husband calls the “gown-tribe.” She criticized what she took to be their commitment to occult powers and incorporeal beings in nature and offers her materialism as an alternative. She explains that her intent is to provide a philosophical system accessible to all, without special training. From her earliest work, Philosophical Fancies, published in 1653, Cavendish argued for materialism in nature. In the first two chapters of that work, which she reprinted in Philosophical and Physical Opinions in 1655, she claims that nature is one infinite material thing, which she sometimes describes as “the substance of infinite matter” (“Condemning Treatise of Atomes”). This infinite material substance is composed of an infinite number of material parts, with infinite degrees of motion. Similarly, this motion is all of the same kind, differing from instance to instance only in swiftness or direction. In other words, the natural world is entirely constituted by a single type of stuff, which she calls matter and a single force, which she calls motion. She distinguishes the objects and events in nature from one another by the varying parts of matter, bearing different motions, within that one infinite material substance. She explicitly extends this materialist doctrine to the human mind in chapter 2 of the Philosophical Fancies, where she says that the forms of the gown-tribe, as well as human minds, are nothing but “matter moving, or matter moved.” Furthermore, she remained committed to this materialism throughout her career, such as in her Observations Upon Experimental Philosophy first published in 1666, claiming that all actions of sense or of reason are corporeal. Thus we see from the very beginning of her first work that she is a materialist.

The exact nature of her materialism develops over time, however. In her earliest work from 1653, she allows for an atomist account of nature and matter, though by 1656 she is already arguing against atomism in her “Condemning Treatise of Atomes”. Later, in her Observations from 1666, she provides at least two arguments against atomism. First, she argues that the concept of an extended yet indivisible body is incoherent, saying, “whatsoever has body, or is material, has quantity; and what has quantity, is divisible” (Ch. 31, 125); this is an argument that was commonly employed against atomism in the seventeenth century. She also argues that composite bodies, each with their own motions, could not account for the unity of the complex body, but would instead be like a swarm of bees or a school of fish. Atomism, she argues, cannot explain organic unity. She says, “[w]herefore, if there should be a composition of atoms, it would not be a body made of parts, but of so many whole and entire single bodies, meeting together as a swarm of bees...and the concourse of them would rather cause a confusion, than a conformity in nature” (Ch. 31, 129). Instead of atomism, Cavendish proposes that matter is both infinite in extension and always further divisible. Furthermore, for Cavendish, complex beings such as animals are composed of distinctive matter in motion, which she takes to provide them with their unity. Even so, her primary targets are not atomist materialism, as much as both the occultism of the Schools and the mechanism of some of her contemporaries.

She also applies her materialism to the human mind. In her early works, she suggests that there is nothing of the human being that is not material. For example, in her first work, she wrote a brief dialogue between body and mind, in which she claims that the only way the mind can attain any sort of life after the death of the body is by fame, that is, by being thought well of by others. Indeed, she elsewhere claims that "all the actions of sense and reason...are corporeal” and “sense and reason are the same in all creatures and all parts of nature” (Ch. 31, 128), as well as, “knowledge, being material, consists of parts” (Ch. 37, 160).

Cavendish seems to qualify her materialism with regard to the human soul later in her career, when she clarifies that her previously strong and consistent commitment to materialism only applies to the natural world. For example, in Observations, she claims that humans have both a material mind and, in addition, a supernatural, immaterial soul. She argues that the way, in which this supernatural soul is related to the material mind and body is itself supernatural. After all, she suggests, place is a property belonging only to bodies and thus, could not belong to an immaterial soul. Therefore, the way, in which the immaterial soul is related to the material person is itself a supernatural, that is, miraculous phenomenon. Unfortunately, she offers little explanation for this immaterial soul and refrains from explaining whether or how the immortal soul might interact at all with anything in nature, instead implying that it does not. To make matters even more confusing, she seems to amend her view in 1668 when claiming that only God is immaterial and all other things are material. It may be that she had changed her mind as to whether or not human beings have immaterial, supernatural souls, but the texts themselves do not seem to speak definitively.

Throughout her work, however, Cavendish did claim that human beings possess a material soul. She explains the material, natural soul in the same way, in which she explains the mind, through her distinction among the different degrees of motion in matter, as mentioned above. Briefly, she claims that matter may have differing degrees of motion, such that some matter is relatively inert and gross, that is, being composed of larger pieces of matter, which she sometimes calls “dull matter”. In contrast, there is also a finer and more rare matter, which possesses more motion. This faster and lighter matter infuses dull matter. The natural, material, human soul or mind, she explains, is the finer, rarer matter within our grosser, cruder material bodies. Scholars have noted the similarity this view bears to Stoic doctrine, in that the rarer, more quickly moving matter resembles the Stoic pneuma.

Just like the Stoics, she also explicitly states in her later works—and suggests at times in her earlier works—that all bodies are completely infused with varying degrees of this active matter. Indeed, it is this matter that accounts for the regularity of natural phenomena across all of nature. She says that “there can be no order, method or harmony, especially such as appears in the actions of nature, without there be reason to cause that order and harmony” (Ch 6, 207). She claims, for example, that animals possess motions visible externally, such as jumping or running, whereas vegetables and minerals possess and exhibit motions only detectable internally, such as contracting or dilating. She refers to the motions found in animals, vegetables and minerals to varying degrees as sensitive spirits, a term that calls to mind Descartes’ animal spirits. But even minerals and vegetables and also animals and humans possess a further, yet finer and more quickly moving form of matter, which she calls “rational spirits.” These rational spirits are the quickly moving, but rare pneuma-like matter described above, which ultimately explain the various motions and behaviors of the natural objects. Ultimately, though, these motions and the matter they infuse are of the same fundamental kind, differing only in their degree of motion. This view, coupled with her radical claims that “all motion is life” and “knowledge is motion” will lead to her vitalism and panpsychism.

Another of Cavendish’s distinctive commitments about the nature of matter is this: matter bears an infinite degree of motion and, crucially, it bears that motion eternally. In other words, if a bit of matter has a certain degree of motion, according to Cavendish, it cannot lose that degree of motion nor communicate it to another piece of matter. We might say that, for Cavendish, the particular degree of motion that a part of matter bears is essential to that part. Thus, the cruder and grosser matter that bears a lesser degree of matter does so by its nature and cannot lose or gain a degree of motion. Similarly, the more quickly moving, finer parts of matter also bear their greater degree of motion by nature and cannot gain, lose or communicate the motion either. This view is related to another major theme of Cavendish’s work, one that we might call vitalism.

b. Vitalism and the Variability Argument

In addition to her commitment to materialism, Cavendish took pains to reject a position that was often associated with materialism in the seventeenth century, namely that of mechanism. Mechanism can be understood as the view that the natural world, as well as human beings, are made up of uniform material components that interact according to laws of motion and collision. One statement of this view, with which Cavendish was familiar, can be found in the opening chapters of Thomas Hobbes’ Leviathan. René Descartes, too, provided a mechanistic account of the natural world—apart from his commitment to the existence of the immaterial souls of human beings, of course.

Cavendish argued that mechanism could not be an accurate account of the natural world, because it could not properly explain the world that we observe. She claimed that two notable features of the natural world are variety and orderliness. The world around us is full of a vast array of different sorts of creatures and things, each performing distinctive activities or bearing distinct properties. Despite the natural world’s plentitude, it was also orderly. If we understand the nature of a particular creature or substance, we could predict successfully how it might behave or react to certain stimuli. Cavendish reasoned that if the world was ultimately constituted by uniform matter, passively receiving and transferring motion, according to mathematical laws of collision, then the universe should be either entirely homogenous or entirely chaotic. In other words, if passive, uniform matter communicating motion was really all we had to explain nature, we would not be able to account for its variety and orderliness—it would lack one or the other.

Instead, she claimed, different parts of the infinite material substance bear different degrees of motion by nature. They cannot directly transfer motion from one body to another, since motion is a property of the body that possesses it and not as something that can exist apart from its body. Thus individual bodies cannot give or receive their motions. Hence, the phenomena we observe are not to be explained by reference to uniform pieces of matter exchanging motion via collision. Rather, she explains, what we see is like a dance, in which each body moves according to its own, distinctive, internal principle, such that a pattern might be created by the dancers on the dance floor. She explicitly offers this dance metaphor in her first work of 1653 and again in 1655. For example, when she explains perception, she claims that the rational spirits flow in and out of the body through the eyes and touch upon the object being perceived, intermixing with the rational spirits found therein. The object, possessing its own distinctive spirits and motions, dances a pattern before the rational spirits, which flow back into the eyes.  These rational spirits then take up the dance themselves, flowing back into the brain and continuing the dance, which she takes to be sufficient for the mind’s perceiving the object in virtue of the mind’s containing the distinctive dance or pattern. In these early works, she further explains that the rational spirits copy these dances based on a “natural sympathy” among adjacent bodies, particularly between the rational spirits of the perceiver and object perceived. Note that, throughout this account of perception, motion is never transferred from one body to another. Instead, motions and “dances” are taken up from the internal activity of the rational spirits, that is, from the nature of the moving matter. The matter moves itself according to its own nature and initiates changes in its own motion via natural sympathy.

By the 1660s, though, she largely replaces the dance metaphor with the terms “imitation” and “figuring out”, the latter in the sense of tracing or copying a shape or distinctive pattern of motion. Even so, the account is largely the same. Her argument from the Observations could be reconstructed as follows:

  1. Bodies move in orderly and infinitely variable ways.
  2. Either they are moved by spirits or they are moved by bodies.
  3. But not spirits because that is mysterious, so bodies.
  4. If bodily motion issues from the body, then, it must issue from either inanimate matter (mechanism) or animate matter (vitalism).
  5. But not inanimate matter (mechanism), for the mechanistic account of bodily motion, (such as animals spirits and inanimate fine particles that transmit force), cannot account for the infinite variety and orderliness of the activity in nature.
  6. So the bodily cause of motion must be the body’s animate matter, which (it is alleged) has an ability to produce an infinite variety of orderly effects.

This is what might be called the argument from the variability and regularity of nature for self-moving matter. Premise 5 implies the argument that if the world was ultimately constituted by uniform matter, passively receiving and transferring motion, according to mathematical laws of collision, then the universe should be either entirely homogenous or entirely chaotic. In this argument for self-moving matter, many of the central themes of Cavendish’s natural philosophy are visible: her materialist rejection of incorporeal causes, her denial of mechanistic explanation and her resulting vitalism.

Another significant feature of her natural philosophy, and one that appears especially clearly when she critiques mechanism, is her refusal to take mathematical physics as an exemplar. Whereas Cartesian and Hobbesian natural philosophy could be described as attempts to understand nature with metaphors and modes of explanation taken from the new, mathematical physics, Cavendish instead draws from other sources, especially her personal experiences with country life and, less directly, the life sciences. When explaining natural phenomena, she often makes reference to the behaviors of animals and humans, as well as her awareness of botanical phenomena. She in fact reported in the 1650s that Gerald’s Herbal, a botanical reference book, was the only scientific work she had read. Perhaps because of this, she often explained the behaviors of an animal’s or plant’s rational spirits in terms of their macro-level behaviors, rather than in terms of atomic or corpuscular, mathematical explanation. By the 1660s, at least, we know that she had read and engaged the work of other vitalist and anti-mechanists, such as the alchemist Johannes Baptista Van Helmont. However, even before that time, her preference for biological metaphors over those of mathematical physics was evident.

Cavendish’s preference for biological modes of explanation can also be seen in her organicism. Not only does she deny atomism, but she also argues that the parts of bodies in part possess their distinctive motions and natures in virtue of the larger, organic systems, in which they are located. She says, “[f]or example: an eye, although it be composed of parts, and has a whole and perfect figure, yet it is but part of the head, and could not subsist without it” (Observations, Ch. 31). This is not an argument for organicism; instead, she means it as an analogy to illustrate her views on individuals more generally.

Despite the similarities of her vitalism to that of Van Helmont or perhaps Henry More, Cavendish also departs from them in her commitment to materialism. Indeed, she accounts for life in nature by claiming that “[a]ll motion is life,” even in her first work of 1653. Human beings are alive, she says, because they are material beings composed of matter with varying degrees of motion moving in a distinctive pattern. For Cavendish that is all that is needed for something to be alive. Note, though, that all things in nature, from humans and animals and plants down to minerals and artifacts, are the things they are, because they are composed of matter with distinctive patterns and degrees of motion. In this regard, she resembles Hobbes, even though she will ultimately reject his mechanistic view of matter, especially with her view that all matter is self-moving. We might therefore say that Cavendish’s natural philosophy is committed to pan-vitalism or animism, or even, as Cudworth would later say, hylozoism. But we must remember that her view departs from the Cambridge Platonists and Van Helmont in denying that the principles of life are to be explained by reference to incorporeal powers, entities or properties. All matter is to some extent alive and all of nature is infused with a principle of life, but this principle of life is simply motion.

Thus Cavendish provides a fairly deflationary account of life as motion and in this regard her natural philosophy may resemble Hobbes or Descartes. Despite this similarity, Cavendish again rejects their mechanism in her denial of determinism, even with regards to bodily interaction. Though she often appeals to the orderliness and regularity of nature in defending her theory of self-moving matter, she also recognizes the presence of disorder in nature, such as in disease. In fact, she explains illness or disease as the rebellion of a part of the body against the whole, explaining that some bits of matter have freely chosen alternative motions and thus disrupted the harmonious all. In short, Cavendish ascribes a libertarian freedom not only to human agents but even to the parts of matter themselves, explaining the behaviors of organisms with a social ‘body politic’ metaphor. We might say, then, that she draws from experiences of the biological and botanical world to explain her metaphysics, but she also incorporates a Hobbesian sense of the body politic into her metaphysics and in so doing reinforces her rejection of the mechanistic worldview.

However, Cavendish does not stop at explaining the principle of life by reference to degrees of motion in matter, because she also claims to explain mental representation and ultimately knowledge in this way. When a particular pattern of motion occurs in the brain, say, via perception, the person perceives the object; for the person to have an idea of the object is just for her brain to contain its distinctive motion. More generally, she takes the presence of such patterned motions in matter to mean that said matter has knowledge, at least in some sense. Yet she also argues that such motions can be found throughout all of nature, every body possessing its own distinctive motions. For these reasons, her vitalist materialism fits nicely with her panpsychism.

c. Panpsychism

In saying that all motion is life and that all things in nature are composed of matter with a degree of motion, Cavendish affirms that life permeates all of the natural world, including what we might call inanimate objects. For Cavendish, inanimate objects are alive, because they possess motion, though they might have a lesser degree of motion, and thus a lesser degree of life, than an animal or human being. Indeed, she also believes that knowledge is similarly diffused across all of nature to greater and lesser degrees. For these reasons, we might call Cavendish an incremental naturalist with regard to knowledge and life. That is, she takes distinctively human traits such as knowledge and life to be natural properties that are present to varying degrees throughout all of nature.

Throughout her work, Cavendish argues that whatever has motion has knowledge and that knowledge is innate or internally directed motion. In her Philosophical Fancies of 1653, she explains that

the touch of the heel, or any part of the body else, is the like motion, as the thought thereof in the head; the one is the motion of the sensitive spirits, the other in the rational spirits, as touch from the sensitive spirits, for thought is only a strong touch, and touch a weak thought. So sense is a weak knowledge, and knowledge a strong sense, made by the degrees of the spirits (Chapter 45).

In the next chapter she continues to argue that all matter exhibits regular motion, which occurs because all matter is infused with sensitive spirits; but to have sensitive spirits is to be able to sense; thus all matter senses things.

Now, in her earliest work, she offers at best a “who knows so why not” sort of argument that matter thinks, saying, “[i]f so, who knows, but vegetables and minerals may have some of those rational spirits, which is a mind or soul in them, as well as man?" and “if their [vegetables and minerals] knowledge be not the same knowledge, but different from the knowledge of animals, by reason of their different figures, made by other kind of motion on other tempered matter, yet it is knowledge” (Chapter 46).

Later, for example in her Observations, she argues that the regularity of nature can best—or perhaps only—be explained by admitting that all material bodies possess knowledge. She argues that matter and material beings exhibit regular motion and then argues that “there can be no regular motion without knowledge, sense, and reason” (Observations, 129). Furhtermore, she argues that each part of the body and each object in nature exhibits a distinctive activity. The brain thinks; the stomach digests; the loins produce offspring—and they do so in regular and consistent ways. Indeed, each of these organs or parts of the body are themselves also composite, made up of an infinite number of smaller bodies. What unites them, however, is their distinctive motions, producing their distinctive behaviors. And Cavendish takes each of these distinctive motions to be a kind of knowledge.

She argues that we ought to think of these distinctive motions as knowledge, because that is the best, or perhaps only, way to explain the regularity and stability of these composites. If these parts are to do these things, they must know what they do, especially given the regular and consistent ways in which they do them. Indeed, without matter knowing its own distinctive motions, she argues, perception would be impossible. She says, “[s]elf-knowledge is the ground, or fundamental cause of perception: for were there not self-knowledge, there could not be perception” (Observations, 155). In short, all material entities, which is to say all things in nature, possess knowledge. The view that all things in nature possess mind or mental properties is panpsychism, to which Cavendish is committed here.

Even so, she uses the concept of knowledge in an unusual way. When she ascribes knowledge to a rock, or to my liver for example, but she neither necessarily means that the rock or my liver have mental states like ours nor that they can perceive their environments in the same way we do. For Cavendish, the knowledge of a thing like a mirror is, indeed, conditioned by the sort of motions that constitute the mirror, the motions that make it the thing it is; as such, mirror-knowledge and mirror-perception are very different from their human analogues. Even so, the mirror’s perception and knowledge are in some ways analogous to human perception and knowledge; both involve the object’s patterning out its own matter in a way, which copies or resembles an external object. Despite this similarity between a mirror and a human, the human being is composed of matter capable of many different kinds of perception and knowledge, whereas the mirror has a very limited ability to pattern out or reflect its environment. And the human has sufficient amounts of rational spirits uniting its parts to be able to conduct rational inquiry, whereas the rational matter of a mirror is very limited indeed.

This might sound as though she is walking back her commitment to panpsychism, but in fact she is not. For these parts or degrees of matter that possess varying levels of awareness are in fact entirely intermixed together in all things. She says, “there is a double perception in all parts of nature, to wit, rational and sensitive.... I believe there is sense and reason, or sensitive and rational knowledge, not only in all creatures, but in every part of every particular creature” (Ch. 36). Thus the rock, though it possesses a great deal of duller matter, also possesses sensitive and even rational spirits within. So Cavendish says,

self-motion is the cause of all the various...actions of nature; these cannot be performed without perception: for all actions are knowing and perceptive; and, were there no perceptions, there could not possibly be any such actions: for, how should parts agree, either in generation, composition, or dissolution of composed figures, if they had no knowledge or perception of each other? (Ch. 37, 167).

In short, Cavendish’s natural philosophy is materialist, vitalist and panpsychist, as well as anti-atomist and anti-mechanist. Unlike many of her opponents who favor mathematical physics, she takes the living things—and the limited awareness of the life sciences—as a model for her natural philosophy, as evidenced in her organicism, as well as her particular use of metaphor. In other words, she agrees with Descartes and Hobbes against the occult explanations of the Scholastics, with More and Van Helmont against the reductive mechanism of Hobbes and Descartes and with Hobbes and Stoic materialism against the incorporeal principles of More and Van Helmont.

d. God

Cavendish’s views on God are puzzling. She regularly repeats that we cannot assert the existence of things that are not observable material objects in the natural world and she does so in a way that might suggest to the modern reader that she does not believe in the immortality of the soul or the existence of an immaterial God. This would likely be a mistake, however, as there are several passages where she instead explains that she does not include God in her speculations, because we cannot speak with any degree of confidence about God’s nature. Though God is mostly absent from her work in the 1650s, in the Observations she says, “there is an infinite difference between divine attributes, and natural properties; wherefore to similize [sic] our reason, will, understanding, faculties, passions and figures etc. to God, is too high a presumption, and in some manner a blasphemy” (“Further Observations”, Ch 10, 215) and “God is incomprehensible, and above nature: but inasmuch as can be known, to wit, his being [i.e., that he exists]; and that he all-powerful...eternal, infinite, omnipotent, incorporeal, individual, immovable being” (*Further Observations*, Ch 11, 216-17). This certainly suggests that she takes God to exist or, at least, that she takes questions of his existence and nature to lie largely outside of the realm of natural philosophy and instead, perhaps, to be a matter of faith alone.

Nevertheless, we might speculate on the details of her views. As mentioned above, her views on the existence of a supernatural soul seem to be in tension with her other metaphysical commitments.  Similarly, her views on the existence of an immaterial God seem similarly in tension. Interestingly, she attaches an erratum on the final page of her first work, Philosophical Fancies, apologizing to the reader for having omitted the appropriate pieties and references to God in her natural philosophical system. What is even stranger is that, when she would reprint and re-write that system in her 1656 Philosophical and Physical Opinions, she would again omit any references to God and instead include the same erratum a second time.

Even so, it is unlikely she thought of herself as an atheist. Perhaps, as some scholars have interpreted Thomas Hobbes, she simply believed that she had no business discussing the nature of God’s existence as that was not a matter of rational inquiry but mere faith. It should be noted, however, that her several discussions of fame suggest that she was not convinced that she would have an existence after her own death.

3. Political Philosophy

In addition to her substantial work on natural philosophy, Cavendish also wrote many other works in a variety of genres, from essays on social issues to poems and plays, even the fantastic utopian fiction The Blazing World. Unlike her work on natural philosophy, however, in which she sets out her views in relatively systematic ways and in philosophical treatises, her thoughts on social or political issues appear in works of fiction or in essays strongly conditioned by rhetorical devices. For example, in Orations of Divers Sorts, she speaks in a variety of voices, imagining several fictional interlocutors who present a number of positions on issues, without indicating the author’s own views. Similarly, in her fiction, she often has several characters advocate for philosophical positions, which complicates any attribution of that view we might make to the author herself. Indeed, in The Blazing World Margaret Cavendish, the Duchess of Newcastle, appears as a character, who advises the Empress of the Blazing World on how her society ought to be governed. In this case, we might feel fairly confident that the views espoused by the character of Cavendish accord with the author’s own, but such attributions should be made only tentatively. Despite the challenges presented by the genres, in which she chose to address these issues, we might still attribute certain general views to her. Among the recurring issues she addressed are aristocracy, gender and fame.

a. Religious Liberty

To see the difficulty in ascribing unambiguous views to Cavendish in these works, consider her thoughts on liberty and stability. In her 1666 fictional work The Blazing World, an Empress has allowed her subjects a degree of political liberty. Regardless of who their parents were, for example, they could now choose their own careers. Some who were born of cobblers could become scientists and others born of soldiers could become priests and so on. In the story, this newfound freedom results in a breakdown of social harmony; the old institutions, by which the society had harmoniously functioned, begin to fail, there is strife and faction, and anarchy and civil war loom. Into this situation arrives the character of Margaret Cavendish who advises the formation of a single state sponsored religion. She further instructs the Empress in architectural details, indicating that an imposing cathedral be built from a magical burning stone found in this fictional world. Made, again, by some magical device, to float above the city, with a voice issuing from the Church with booming decrees that the old ways be reinstated, with everyone being born into and retaining the stations. The character of Cavendish proposes that doing so will cow the factious citizens and make them agree, so that cobblers will beget cobblers, soldiers give rise to soldiers and so on. When the Empress executes this plan social harmony is restored. This suggests to the reader that the author Cavendish opposes the sort of political liberty (or, perhaps better, social mobility) that the Empress had allowed; the reader might also conclude that Cavendish supports the institution of a strong state Church.

Yet in her 1662 Orations of Divers Sorts, she states in one of her orations that, if the people have already adopted a variety of religious views, then the government should grant liberty of conscience—that is, freedom of religion—because doing so is the only way to maintain peace. Indeed she says explicitly there that the government should grant this liberty, because a failure to do so will result in anarchy. Then, in the next oration immediately after, she argues from a different perspective, claiming instead that liberty of conscience would lead to liberty in the state, which in turn would result in anarchy. Political liberty, she claims, undermines the rule of law, without which there can be no justice and thus there will be anarchy. Finally, she presents a third oration in defense of a middle view. There she argues that liberty of conscience is acceptable if it concerns only private devotions, but not if it disrupts the public. In other words, if their religious beliefs do neither violate any laws nor harm the public, then those beliefs are to be allowed. We might speculate that she intends this final, middle view to be taken as the author’s own, but it is not always clear, especially when, rather than presenting two views and concluding with a compromise, she instead presents six or seven different opinions, as she does on the question of whether women are equal to men. Even so, the reader may suspect that, in this case, the compromise view is closest to Cavendish’s own.

One feature that unites these varied discussions, however, is Cavendish’s fundamental commitment to the importance of political stability. In each of the above cases, she motivates her position by assuming that social and political stability must be preserved above all. All the orations, as well as the character of Cavendish in The Blazing World, seem to assume that political stability is the goal and that the sovereign ought to employ whatever means will be successful in securing it. Like Hobbes, then, Cavendish takes the primary function of the State to provide stability. This attitude recurs in her defenses of royalism and aristocracy.

b. Royalism and Aristocracy

Cavendish came from a family of royalists, served as a maid in waiting to Queen Henrietta Maria during her and Charles the Second’s exile from England at the hands of the republican revolutionaries of Cromwell and married one of Charles’s staunchest royalist supporters, William Cavendish, Duke of Newcastle. Her commitment to royalism and, more generally, to aristocracy, appears frequently in her writing. When she discusses how a country ought to be governed, she is unwavering in her view that states are best ruled by a King or Queen, who should come from the aristocracy.

One can draw an interesting analogy between her natural philosophy and her politics here. When discussing the distinction between health and illness in animals, Cavendish describes the organism as a body politic; the healthy body is one, in which each part of the body plays its role appropriately, whereas a diseased body is one, in which one or more parts are in rebellion, acting against their natures, to the detriment of the whole organism. Indeed, given her vitalism and panpsychism, she might describe disease in the human body and political unrest or rebellion in remarkably similar terms. In both cases, the whole body is composed of a variety of different parts, each with its own distinctive activity or motion. Each part knows its role, its place, in the body politic, yet each part is free to direct its motions in a way contrary to its natural activity. If a part chooses to do so, it will throw the orderly harmony of the whole out of balance. To expand upon this metaphysical account, we might say that, for Cavendish, people have certain stations—roles and places—in society from birth by nature and social harmony is achieved when the citizens conduct themselves according to their knowledge of their own distinctive activities. As long as the cobblers cobble, the soldiers defend, the judges judge and the rulers rule, social harmony will be maintained and each person can cultivate themselves accordingly.

Indeed, this seems to be one of the central features of Cavendish the character’s advice to the Empress in The Blazing World. Being a fantastical and quasi-science fictional story, The Blazing World features citizens of a variety of animal species, all sentient, capable of human language and so on. Originally, each species has their own distinctive roles, belonging to their own, species-specific guilds. It is to this world that Cavendish urges the Empress to return, one where the citizens are like different species, each with their own peculiar skills and roles received in virtue of what sorts of people their parents were. If the people of The Blazing World simply accepted the stations into which they were born, social harmony would be regained. It is difficult not to see this as a parable of the Restoration of Charles II and the English aristocracy; peace is restored to England by the return of the aristocracy. Moreover, in 1665, the year before The Blazing World was published, her family was restored their lands and her husband was advanced to Dukedom for his service to the King during the Civil Wars.

c. Gender

Cavendish is also described at times as an early feminist. To be sure, her own remarkable life as an author and philosopher leads many to take her as an exemplar; one might say she was a feminist in deed, if not always in word.

Beyond that, though, some scholars argue that her writings are feminist as well. For many of the reasons cited above, such claims can be complicated. Consider the seven orations on women in her Orations of Divers Sorts. There she presents seven speeches that take up a variety of positions. She begins by lamenting the fact that men possess all the power and women entirely lack it. In a subsequent oration, she speculates that women lack power in society, due to natural inferiority. She then counters in the next oration that women might be able to achieve as much as men were they given the opportunity to engage in traditionally masculine activities. But the next speaker claims that, were women to imitate men in this way, they would become “hermaphroditical.” Instead, this orator suggests, women should cultivate feminine virtues such as chastity and humility. In the very next oration, however, the orator suggests that feminine virtues are inferior to masculine, so women should pursue masculine virtues instead. She concludes the series of orations on this topic with a new position, arguing that women are in fact superior to men because women, through their beauty, can control men.

What is the reader to make of this series of orations? It seems likely that Cavendish affirms the following empirical facts about her society: women lack power; women could gain fame and even perhaps power if they pursued masculine virtues; they might even be equally capable as men in cultivating these virtues; yet women would be despised if they did pursue these virtues; if women cultivated feminine virtues, they would not be despised and could even acquire a kind of indirect power, but such a state of affairs is ultimately inferior to the power men possess. What is less clear is whether Cavendish really believes that the pursuit of so-called masculine virtues would somehow harm women by causing them to deny their natures. In other words, it is not clear from these orations whether Cavendish thinks women are naturally inferior to men. In her earlier Worlds Olio, on the other hand, she seems less ambivalent, claiming that women are in general inferior to men at rhetoric. Some women may cultivate skill in rhetoric to rival and even exceed that of men, but they are few, she claims, in this work.

Some readers might point to The Blazing World, and to the power of the Empress or the success of the character of Cavendish as a political adviser. It is true that the Empress leads her people in a successful naval battle, defeating a mortal enemy of her homeland. A similar event occurs in her story Bell in Campo. Even so, the considerations above suggest that social harmony is restored because she returns to aristocratic values. After all, the notion that a woman might lead an empire, even into war, would not be so foreign to an English subject in the 1660s, given that Queen Elizabeth ruled just a few decades before and had overseen the important naval defeat of the Spanish Armada.

From her first work and throughout her career, Cavendish engaged the issue of women in her writing, reflecting on her own experience as a woman and how, or whether, it shaped her writing or philosophy. Thus, with her impressive life and regular consideration of the relevance of gender to her thought, Cavendish can be seen as an important precursor for later more explicitly feminist writers, even if she herself might not be aptly so described.

4. References and Further Reading

(Formater: Insert paragraphs for this section here.)

a. Cavendish’s Works in the 17th Century

Only the first publication is listed for each work; Cavendish revised and reprinted several of her works multiple times over the years. So, for example, Observations Upon Experimental Philosophy first appeared in 1666 but reappeared, with the addition of The Blazing World, in 1668. And Grounds of Natural Philosophy is a substantially revised version of her earlier Philosophical and Physical Opinions, itself, which contained her early Philosophical Fancies as its first part.

  • Cavendish, Margaret, Philosophical Fancies, London: printed by Thomas Roycroft for J. Martin and J. Allestrye, 1653.
  • Cavendish, Margaret, The World's Olio, London: printed for J. Martin and J. Allestrye, 1655.
  • Cavendish, Margaret, Philosophical and Physical Opinions, London: printed for J. Martin and J. Allestrye, 1655.
  • Cavendish, Margaret, Nature’s Pictures, London: printed for J. Martin and J. Allestrye, 1656.
  • Cavendish, Margaret, Plays, London: printed for J. Martin, J. Allestrye and T. Dicas, 1662.
  • Cavendish, Margaret, Orations of Divers Sorts, Accommodated to Divers Places, London: printed by W. Wilson, 1662.
  • Cavendish, Margaret, ‘Bell in Campo’, in Playes, London: J. Martin, J. Allestrye and T. Dicas, 1662.
  • Cavendish, Margaret, Sociable Letters, London: printed by William Wilson, 1664.
  • Cavendish, Margaret, Philosophical Letters, London: possibly printed by David Maxwell, 1664.
  • Cavendish, Margaret, Observations Upon Experimental Philosophy, London: printed by Anne Maxwell, 1666.
  • Cavendish, Margaret, The Description of a New World, Called the Blazing World, London: printed by A. Maxwell, 1666.
  • Cavendish, Margaret, Life of William, London: printed by A. Maxwell, 1667.
  • Cavendish, Margaret, Grounds of Natural Philosophy, London: printed by A. Maxwell, 1668.

b. Modern Editions of Her Works

  • Cavendish, Margaret, The Description Of A New World, Called The Blazing World And Other Writings, ed, Kate Lilley. London: William Pickering, 1992.
  • Cavendish, Margaret, Paper Bodies: A Margaret Cavendish Reader, eds. Sylvia Bowerbank and Sara Mendelson. Peterborough, ON: Broadview Press, 2000.
  • Cavendish, Margaret, Observations upon Experimental Philosophy, ed. Eileen O'Neill. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2001.
  • Cavendish, Margaret, Margaret Cavendish: Political Writings, ed. Susan James. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2003.

c. Secondary Literature

  • Battigelli, Anna, 1998, Margaret Cavendish and The Exiles of the Mind, Lexington: The University Press of Kentucky.
    • An overview of Cavendish’s life and works from a scholar of English literature, with discussions on genre and rhetorical devices in her works.
  • Boyle, Deborah, 2006,“Fame, Virtue, and Government: Margaret Cavendish on Ethics and Politics,” Journal of the History of Ideas, 67: 251–289.
    • One of the few discussions of Cavendish’s ethics, with a productive focus on fame.
  • Boyle, Deborah, 2013, “Margaret Cavendish on Gender, Nature, and Freedom,” Hypatia 28 (3): 516-532.
    •  An excellent account of the complexities of Cavendish on gender.
  • Broad, Jacqueline, 2002, Women Philosophers of the Seventeenth Century, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
    • This text contains a chapter on Cavendish.
  • Clucas, Stephen, 1994, “The Atomism of the Cavendish Circle: A Reappraisal,” The Seventeenth Century, 9: 247–273.
    • Clucas argues that Cavendish never really gave up atomism.
  • Cunning, David, 2006, “Cavendish on the Intelligibility of the Prospect of Thinking Matter,” History of Philosophy Quarterly, 23: 117–136.
    • A discussion of Cavendish and the notion of thinking matter, with connections to contemporary philosophy of mind.
  • Cunning, David, 2010, “Margaret Lucas Cavendish,” Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
  • Detlefsen, Karen, 2006, “Atomism, Monism, and Causation in the Natural Philosophy of Margaret Cavendish,” in Daniel Garber and Steven Nadler (eds.), Oxford Studies in Early Modern Philosophy, 3: 199–240
    • A long and thorough exploration of some themes in Cavendish’s metaphysics. She refutes Clucas on atomism and provides an insightful analysis on causation.
  • Detlefsen, Karen, 2007, “Reason and Freedom: Margaret Cavendish on the Order and Disorder of Nature,” Archiv für Geschichte der Philosophie, 89: 157–191.
    • Detlefsen notes that matter itself must be free of necessity, in order to explain the disorder in nature that Cavendish allows for, especially in disease, in part via a ‘body politic’ analogy.
  • Detlefsen, Karen, 2009, “Margaret Cavendish on the Relationship Between God and World,” Philosophy Compass, 4: 421–438.
    • An overview of Cavendish’s views on God.
  • Duncan, Stewart, 2013, “Cavendish and the Divine, Supernatural, Immaterial Soul,” The Mod Squad: A Group Blog in Modern Philosophy, Accessed November 4, 2014.
    • A discussion and consideration of the nature and role of the supernatural soul in Cavendish’s metaphysics.
  • Duncan, Stewart, 2012, “Debating Materialism: Cavendish, Hobbes, and More,” History of Philosophy Quarterly 29 (4): 391-409.
    • An analysis of Cavendish that clarifies and contextualizes her materialism vis-à-vis Hobbes and More, with whom her thought shares some important similarities.
  • Hutton, Sarah, 1997, “In Dialogue with Thomas Hobbes: Margaret Cavendish's natural philosophy,” Women's Writing, 4: 421–432.
    • Cavendish’s debt, and response, to Hobbes’s metaphysics.
  • James, Susan, 1999, “The Philosophical Innovations of Margaret Cavendish,” British Journal for the History of Philosophy, 7: 219–244.
    • An excellent overview of the major themes in Cavendish’s metaphysics.
  • James, Susan, 2003, “Introduction,” in Margaret Cavendish: Political Writings, ed. Susan James, Cambridge: Cambridge UP (2003).
    • An overview of Cavendish’s social and political themes.
  • Kroetsch, Cameron, 2013, “List of Margaret Cavendish’s Texts, Printers, and Booksellers,” The Digital Cavendish Project, Accessed November 4, 2014.
    • A detailed account of the printing and publishing of Cavendish’s works.
  • Lascano, Marcy. “An Introduction to Margaret Cavendish, or ‘Why You Should Include Margaret Cavendish in Your Early Modern Course and Buy the Book.’” The Mod Squad, A Group Blog in Early Modern Philosophy. Accessed July 14, 2014.
    •  Lascano makes a compelling case for the inclusion of Cavendish in Early Modern Philosophy survey courses.
  • Lewis, Eric, 2001, “The Legacy of Margaret Cavendish,” Perspective on Science, 9: 341–365.
    • An overview of Cavendish’s reception, both among her contemporaries and ours. Valuable in part for its identification of lacunae in recent scholarship.
  • Michaelian, Kourken, 2009, “Margaret Cavendish's Epistemology,” British Journal for the History of Philosophy, 17: 31–53.
    • The only extended discussion of Cavendish’s epistemology, with a special focus on her distinction of internal and external knowledge.
  • O'Neill, Eileen, 1998, “Disappearing Ink: Early Modern Women Philosophers and Their Fate in History,” in Janet A. Kourany (ed.), Philosophy in a Feminist Voice, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
    • The locus classicus for discussion of the way in which women philosophers were written out of histories in the past two centuries.
  • O'Neill, Eileen, 2001, “Introduction,” in Margaret Cavendish, Observations Upon Experimental Philosophy, Eileen O'Neill (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, x-xxxvi.
    • An excellent account of Cavendish’s mature thought, in what is arguably her greatest work.
  • Sarasohn, Lisa, 2010, The Natural Philosophy of Margaret Cavendish: Reason and Fancy During the Scientific Revolution, Baltimore, MA: The Johns Hopkins University Press.
    • An examination of Cavendish’s natural philosophy by an historian of science.
  • Whitaker, Katie, 2002, Mad Madge: The Extraordinary Life of Margaret CavendishDuchess of Newcastle, the First Woman to Live by Her Pen, New York: Basic Books.
    • An entertaining biography of Cavendish.

Author Information

Eugene Marshall
Florida International University
U. S. A.

Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz (1646-1716)

LeibnizWidely hailed as a universal genius, Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz was one of the most important thinkers of the late 17th and early 18th centuries. A polymath and one of the founders of calculus, Leibniz is best known philosophically for his metaphysical idealism; his theory that reality is composed of spiritual, non-interacting “monads,” and his oft-ridiculed thesis that we live in the best of all possible worlds. Though these ideas may make his philosophy seem exceedingly abstract, Leibniz had keen interest in less abstract fields, such as empirical physics and jurisprudence. He also made great contributions to logic, with some considering him the greatest logician since Aristotle.

Due to his belief in a rationally ordered universe, his commitment to the principle of sufficient reason, and his acceptance of innate ideas, Leibniz is rightly ranked along with Descartes and Spinoza as one of the seminal early modern rationalists. Leibniz stands out in this tradition, however, for his novel efforts to find compatibility between classical and modern thought. He retained ancient and scholastic notions such as substantial form and final cause, while at the same time attempting to improve upon the mechanical philosophies of Hobbes, Spinoza, and Descartes. He also hoped his comprehensive philosophical system would serve as a common ground for uniting the determinedly divided Christian denominations in Europe. Such irenic pursuits make Leibniz a unique transitional figure in the history of philosophy. He has been called both the last in the lineage of great Christian Platonists and the first thinker to tackle the intellectual problems of modern Europe. After an introduction to his life and works, this article will examine the key elements of Leibniz’s ambitious philosophical program.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Writings
  2. Key Principles
  3. Metaphysics
    1. Substantial Forms
    2. Substance as Complete Concept
    3. Causality and Pre-Established Harmony
    4. Idealism
    5. The Nature of Body
    6. Efficient and Final Causality
  4. Theodicy
    1. Leibniz’s Project
    2. God
    3. Possible Worlds and Optimism
    4. Freedom and Necessity
  5. Epistemology
    1. Ideas and Knowledge
    2. Innate Ideas
    3. Petites Perceptions
    4. Reflection, Memory, Selfhood
  6. Ethics
    1. Intellect and Will
    2. Justice and Charity
  7. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources: Leibniz Texts and Translations
    2. Secondary Sources
      1. Introductory Texts
      2. More Advanced Studies
      3. Collected Essays

1. Life and Writings

Leibniz was born on 1 July 1646, during the waning years of the Thirty Years’ War, in the Lutheran town of Leipzig. His father, Friedrich, was professor of moral philosophy at the University in Leipzig. His mother, Catherina Schmuck, was the daughter of a law professor. Leibniz grew up in an educated, and by all accounts, orthodox Lutheran environment. Between the books of his father, those of his maternal grandfather, and the contributions of Friedrich’s bookselling former father-in-law, Leibniz had access to an impressive library. At a young age, he gained a love for classical literature and the writings of the Church Fathers.

From 1661-63, Leibniz pursued university studies in Leipzig, with a brief stay at the university in Jena in 1663. At the time, the curriculum at these universities was still largely scholastic with some pedagogical practices bearing traces of the Ramist encyclopedic tradition. Leibniz’s main teachers, Jakob Thomasius in Leipzig and Erhard Weigel in Jena, were Aristotelians with eclectic interests. Leibniz had his own eclectic interests, having gained some, mostly second-hand, familiarity with modern mechanical philosophy. Later in his life, he recounted a fateful stroll through the Rosental in Leipzig in which he debated the respective merits of scholastic and modern thinking. “Mechanism finally prevailed,” he recalled, “and led me to apply myself to mathematics” (G III, 606). Though steeped in classical and scholastic learning, Leibniz at quite a young age fashioned himself a man of the times.

Leibniz went on to pursue a degree in law, earning his doctorate from the University in Altdorf in 1666. His writings from his student years include his bachelor’s dissertation, A Metaphysical Disputation on the Principle of Individuation, an early work in combinatorial logic titled A Dissertation on the Art of Combinations, and works on legal theory.

After short stints in Nuremburg and Frankfurt, Leibniz took his first major employment in the Catholic court of the Prince-Archbishop of Mainz, Johann Philipp von Schӧnborn in 1668. Leibniz was tasked with reforming legal codes and statutes. During his time in Mainz, Leibniz struck up an important relationship with Baron Johann Christian von Boineburg, the central statesman in the Mainz court. Boineburg appreciated Leibniz’s considerable talents and set before him the task of solving the day’s most pressing philosophical and theological questions. Through his association with Boineburg, Leibniz began to see the challenges modern philosophy, especially the materialism of Gassendi and Hobbes, posed to belief in the immortality of the soul, to belief in God and natural law, and to both Catholic and Lutheran understandings of the Eucharist. Leibniz thus from 1668-70 began working on a number of preliminary studies meant to be part of a comprehensive work entitled Catholic Demonstrations. Though this dreamed-of magnum opus never materialized, Leibniz never abandoned his goal of developing a modern philosophy congenial to Christian theology. In addition to his Catholic Demonstrations writings, Leibniz’s Elements of Natural Law, written between 1669 and 1671, also contributed to these efforts. Furthermore, during this period Leibniz intensified his interest in physics, writing the Theory of Abstract Motion and the New Physical Hypothesis, and penning an unanswered letter to Thomas Hobbes on the Englishman’s physical theory as it relates to the philosophy of mind. Leibniz in hindsight found these youthful physical works unimpressive, but they attest to the diversity of his interests.

Mainz opened Leibniz to an extraordinarily broad range of philosophical concerns; his most intense period of intellectual development soon followed. In 1672, Leibniz was dispatched to Paris on a diplomatic mission as well as on personal business for Boineburg. Paris exposed Leibniz to learning, resources, and interlocutors the likes of which he had never seen. He had access to the unpublished writings of Descartes and Pascal. He met with leading Parisian intellectuals Antoine Arnauld and Nicholas Malebranche. He studied mathematics under the Dutch mathematician Christiaan Huygens. He twice visited London, in 1673 and 1676, meeting with the mathematicians and physicists of the Royal Society. Leibniz’s friend Walther von Tschirnhaus, though forbidden from showing Leibniz an advanced copy, apprised Leibniz of many of the contents of Spinoza’s Ethics. This led Leibniz, upon leaving Paris in 1676, to make an excursion to The Hague to visit Spinoza.

Paris and London offered Leibniz the opportunity to establish himself as a rising star in the European intellectual orbit and Leibniz did not squander his chance. By 1675 he had developed the infinitesimal calculus, only three years after he started the serious study of contemporary mathematics. He also continued to write on a wide range of philosophical topics. His Confession of a Philosopher of 1672-3 was his first response to the problem of evil and to the question of determinism. His most important collection of metaphysical papers from the period, De summa rerum, contains some of Leibniz’s early responses to Spinoza’s monism, with budding reflections on the relationship between mind and body, on the nature of the continuum, and on universal harmony.

In 1676, Leibniz accepted a position in the court of Duke Johann Friedrich of Hanover, employed mainly to serve as court librarian and to consult on engineering projects in the Harz mines. After his taste of the intellectual scenes in Paris and London, Leibniz found life in Hanover a disappointment. Despite his lack of professional prospects, Leibniz would in the ensuing decade sharpen his intellectual vision. He published a number of important essays on mathematics, epistemology, and physics in the new journal Acta Eruditorum. In 1686, while it snowed in the Harz, Leibniz composed “a little discourse on metaphysics.” Now published without the diminutive “little,” the Discourse on Metaphysics is widely considered Leibniz’s first mature philosophical statement. Leibniz sent a summary of the Discourse to Arnauld, sparking an extended and illuminating correspondence between them on issues of freedom, causality, and occasionalism.

In 1689, Leibniz travelled to Italy on official business, researching possible ancestral ties to the Guelf Dukes of Hanover. Leibniz, never one to let official duties interfere with his own intellectual agenda, used the opportunity to pitch his metaphysics to leading Catholic intellectuals. He also wrote works on cosmology in efforts to exonerate the Copernican system from Vatican censure.

Leibniz returned in 1690 to Hanover, which remained his home base until his death. Leibniz continued to write prodigiously and we can mention here only a small sample of his works. 1695 saw the publication of the first part of his Specimen of Dynamics and his New System of Nature. The former work included Leibniz’s reflections on the nature of force, and in many ways was developed in response to Newton’s Principia Mathematica; the latter was Leibniz’s first public presentation of his theory of pre-established harmony. In 1703, Leibniz began work on The New Essays on Human Understanding, a book-length dialogue in response to Locke’s Essay on Human Understanding. The only book Leibniz published during his lifetime, the Theodicy, was released in 1710. In this work, Leibniz defends his thesis that we live in best of all possible worlds and defends the reasonableness of Christianity against the fideism and skepticism of Pierre Bayle. In 1714, Leibniz wrote the Monadology, the last comprehensive summary statement of his philosophical views.

Throughout his years in Hanover, Leibniz maintained a stunning number of epistolary correspondents. Notable among these were Samuel Clark, Burchard de Volder, Johann Bernoulli, Bartholomew Des Bosses, and Christian Wolff. Leibniz also corresponded and often met with Sophie, Electress of Hanover, and her daughter Sophie Charlotte, Queen of Prussia. These women encouraged, and in many ways made possible, Leibniz’s philosophical pursuits while employed at the court.

Leibniz’s final years were clouded by charges that he stole ideas from the papers of Isaac Newton when developing the calculus in the 1670s. Leibniz has been cleared of the charges and it is now accepted that the two men developed the calculus independently. Leibniz died on 14 November 1716 after struggles with gout and arthritis.

Unlike the other major philosophical lights of his era, and despite having written more than any of them, Leibniz produced no magnum opus. He seemed most at home in dialogue, in correspondence, and in controversy. The Discourse on Metaphysics and Monadology are his most commonly studied works in metaphysics. Scholars disagree about the extent to which the two works are in accord, but they together provide a solid grounding in Leibniz’s thought. The Theodicy is a classic of philosophical theology and the New Essays provides the fullest account of Leibniz’s epistemology. This article will summarize Leibniz’s philosophy mainly as it is presented in these works. It would be a mistake, however, to think that one can get a full picture of Leibniz’s interests from these works and the reader is encouraged to consult the many excellent edited selections of Leibniz’s texts.

2. Key Principles

Several key principles form the core of Leibniz’s philosophy. Though Leibniz never lists these serially in the manner of, for instance, the axioms of Spinoza’s Ethics, the principles nonetheless shape Leibniz’s thinking and ground his major claims. He refers to them throughout his writings and we shall refer to them throughout our discussion. Though each of these principles merits further analysis in its own right, we introduce them only briefly here. Truly unique to Leibniz is not so much these principles in themselves as the use to which he collectively puts them.

In the Monadology, Leibniz writes that we reason “based on two great principles” (M 30). The first of these is the principle of contradiction, which deems every contradiction to be false. Classically stated, the principle of contradiction holds that something cannot be both “x” and “not x” at the same time and in the same respect. Aristotle claimed that all logic and reasoning presupposes the principle of contradiction and Leibniz sees no reason to think otherwise.

The second great principle of reason is the principle of sufficient reason, “by virtue of which we consider that we can find no true or existent fact, no true assertion, without there being a sufficient reason why it is thus and not otherwise, although most of these reasons cannot be known to us” (M 31). The classical statement of the principle of sufficient reason is nihil sine ratione: there is nothing without reason or cause. Leibniz holds that every state of affairs has an explanation, even if we must admit that we often do not have sufficient information to provide an explanation. The principle of sufficient reason assumes great prominence in Leibniz’s philosophy, most notably in his accounts of substance, causality, freedom, and optimism.

Closely related to the principle of sufficient reason is the principle of the best. This principle holds that rational beings always choose, and act for, the best. In this way, reason is teleologically ordered towards goodness. On Leibniz’s thinking, if reason did not opt for what is best, it would act arbitrarily; it would not have a sufficient reason for choosing one option over another, thus violating reason’s second great principle. Goodness provides the sufficient reason for rational choice. The principle of the best manifests itself differently in the cases of God and created minds. God, whom Leibniz considers “an absolutely perfect being” (DM 1), and who thus knows what is best, always acts in the best way. Created minds, who have a finite degree of perfection and thus limited knowledge of what is best, always act according to what seems the best from their limited perspectives.

The predicate-in-notion principle provides Leibniz’s notion of truth: praedicatum inest subjecto. In any true, affirmative proposition the predicate is contained in the subject. In order for the proposition, “Leibniz is a mathematician,” to be true, the idea “mathematician” must somehow be included in the idea “Leibniz.” Leibniz’s interpretation of the predicate-in-notion principle, we shall see, has far-reaching consequences for his metaphysics. Somewhat relatedly, Leibniz affirms the principle of the identity of indiscernibles, which states that any two objects sharing all properties are in fact the same, identical object. Each individual object contains some individuating characteristic. Important for Leibniz, this individuating characteristic must be something intrinsic to the individual, and not simply a separation in space and time, which Leibniz considers purely extrinsic denominations. The principle of the identity of indiscernibles is tied closely to the predicate-in-notion principle insofar as the latter makes intrinsic properties the basis of all truth and the former makes such properties the basis for identity and individuation.

A final key principle worth noting is the principle of continuity. “Nothing takes place suddenly, and it is one of my great principles that nature never makes leaps,” Leibniz writes in the New Essays. “I call this the Law of continuity” (NE 56). All change is continuous; there is never a leap, but rather a series of intervening stages. This principle is especially germane to Leibniz’s development of the infinitesimal calculus, but relevant too to his metaphysics and epistemology.

3. Metaphysics

a. Substantial Forms

One of the earliest intellectual projects Leibniz set for himself was to determine the proper relationship between the Aristotelian philosophy taught at his university in Leipzig and the new, mechanical philosophy espoused by thinkers like Galileo, Descartes, and Hobbes. Leibniz embraces modern, mechanical physics as the proper method for investigating nature, yet he is distinctive among 17th century thinkers for the depths of his efforts to retain several key metaphysical concepts of ancient and medieval philosophy. Chief among these concepts is the Aristotelian idea of substantial form. Though Leibniz does not adopt the traditional understanding of substantial form in its details, his grappling with the legitimacy of this notion sets the trajectory for much of his metaphysics.

Aristotle, with the medieval scholastics following him, argues that any individual thing consists of a substantial form, which determines the kind of thing it is, and matter, which individuates the thing and makes it numerically distinct from other like substances. So, a particular squirrel consists of the universal form “squirrel” shaping and directing particular material stuff. In the 17th century, the idea that substantial forms should enter into physical accounts of nature becomes especially odious. Citing “squirrelness,” the moderns maintain, tells us nothing regarding the activity of a squirrel. For thinkers such as Hobbes and Descartes, substantial forms are useless fictions, at best superfluous and at worst misleading. The mathematically-based, mechanical laws governing matter in motion suffice to explain the whole of nature, with no need to take into account the kind of thing under investigation. What counts in describing the behavior of a squirrel is not its “squirrelness,” but the forces its limbs exert on one another, the pressure differentials in its circulatory system, and other quantifiable data. This approach makes it possible to have a single method for investigating all natural phenomena.

Leibniz agrees that substantial forms have no use in physics, but he insists metaphysical accounts of reality require something like substantial forms. Mechanical explanation adequately addresses the activity of the physical world, but not its underlying nature. For Leibniz, the corporeal world its very essence depends on incorporeal principles. Both Hobbes’ purely materialist metaphysics and the strict substance-dualism of Descartes fail to properly appreciate nature’s dependence on purely metaphysical entities. Ultimately, Leibniz’s defense of substantial forms provides the first step in the development of his idealist metaphysics.

Leibniz offers several defenses of substantial forms, in which he tries not to revive Aristotle’s notion of form wholesale, so much as to prove the existence of irreducible, incorporeal entities. One argument turns on the principle of sufficient reason: the fact that the corporeal world itself cannot offer any explanation for its particular features. Why does a given body occupy so much space, have a particular shape, or move in just this way? By limiting oneself to mechanical explanation, one can either say that body A’s features were caused by body B, or one can say that body A has had its particular constitution from eternity. The former approach leads to an infinite regress in explanation, which is to say it never arrives at an explanation at all. There is always yet another body requiring explanation. The latter approach, for Leibniz, likewise offers no real explanation. Citing eternity as a reason, he feels, amounts to answering the question “Why is A, x?” with “Simply because A is x and always has been x,” dodging the question. Since the corporeal world does not contain sufficient explanation for its own features, Leibniz concludes that the cause of such features lies in incorporeal principles.

In a second defense of incorporeal substantial principles, Leibniz denies the Cartesian distinction between the primary qualities of bodies and secondary qualities such as color and temperature (DM 12). Descartes, anticipating Locke, argues that the secondary qualities of bodies are relative to the perceiving subject. For instance, as we observe in cases of color-blindness, one person perceives an object as red and another person the same object as green. Color, the argument goes, is thus not a property of the body itself, but depends on the interaction between object and perceiver. Descartes holds, however, that size, shape, and motion are not relative properties, but constitute the essence of body itself. Leibniz, believing that space and time are relative, counters that these primary properties which depend on space and time, and also include something relative to perception. No perceived material quality, therefore, accounts for what a body essentially is. It follows that incorporeal principles must be the real metaphysical building blocks of reality.

A third argument for substantial forms comes in Leibniz’s treatment of force. Descartes had confused force with what we would call momentum. He measured force by multiplying mass by velocity, not by acceleration, or the square of velocity. For Leibniz, this error on the part of Descartes points to an important fact about reality. Motion, measured by mv, is relative. When several objects change positions, one cannot with certainty attribute motion to one object or another. Force, however, has more reality. We have sufficient reason to attribute it to one body over others. In other words, we have more certainty which body in a system is the proximate cause of changes in other bodies. Force, therefore, has more reality than motion, and yet force is not corporeal in the way both mass and velocity are since force is not extended. Though Descartes’ confusion seems simply an error in calculation, in it Leibniz sees additional indication that the realities grounding corporeal objects are not themselves corporeal.

b. Substance as Complete Concept

Though his defense of incorporeal substances allows Leibniz to partially reconcile pre-modern and modern thought, Leibniz still needs to articulate his own account of the nature of these substances. In §8 of the Discourse on Metaphysics, Leibniz takes up the task of defining individual substance. He begins with Aristotle’s definition, which states that when many things are said of a subject, yet it is said of nothing else, this subject is rightly called an individual substance. So, for instance, we say of Alexander the Great that he is Macedonian and ambitious, but we do not say of anything else that it is Alexander the Great. Thus, Alexander is an individual substance.

Leibniz deems this Aristotelian definition of substance merely logical. It tells us something about the structure of thought and language, but does not provide a metaphysical account of substance. To move to a proper metaphysical understanding, Leibniz believes we must look more closely at the nature of predication. “All true predication,” he writes, “has some basis in the nature of things.” Here, Leibniz shows his belief that there is isomorphism between metaphysics and logic. All true propositions have an ontological basis. All we can truly say of Alexander the Great is included in Alexander’s nature.

The idea that each substance includes all the predicates which belong to it is, Leibniz takes it, simply a metaphysical restatement of the predicate-in-notion principle. On the basis of this principle, Leibniz arrives at his notion of substance as a complete concept:

The nature of an individual substance or of a complete being is to have a notion so complete that it is sufficient to contain and to allow us to deduce from it all the predicates of the subject to which the notion is attributed. (DM 8)

Leibniz’s thought is essentially this: if one had a sufficiently powerful intellect, one could deduce from the idea of any individual substance all that could ever be said of it, in just the same way that if one has a clear and distinct idea of a circle, one can deduce all the properties of a circle. From the very concept of Alexander the Great, the infinite intellect of God can deduce all Alexander’s qualities, including that he is the vanquisher of Darius. To be a substance, then, is to have such a corresponding complete concept. Every substance, as it were, includes its biography.

Beginning in the 1690s, “monad” becomes Leibniz’s preferred term for a complete, incorporeal, individual substance. The term monad derives from the Greek mónos, meaning alone or solitary. Leibniz introduces the term to underscore the fact that individual substances are not only complete, but also simple. As Leibniz’s defense of substantial forms showed, the material realm needs grounding in something incorporeal. Matter, however, can be infinitely divided. Leibniz therefore reasons that there must be infinite simple monads populating the world at even the most infinitesimal levels. Leibniz likens the fullness and complexity of the monadic universe to “nested” ponds and gardens.

Each portion of matter can be conceived as a garden full of plants, and as a pond full of fish. But each branch of a plant, each limb of an animal, each drop of its humors, is still another such garden or pond. (M 67)

Monads are thus “spiritual atoms,” the incorporeal building blocks of all reality. They are the complete entities which merit the designation “substance.”

It is in the nature of each monad to have its own internal principle of activity. As Leibniz writes, “activity is of the essence of substance in general” (NE 65). Beginning in the 1690s, Leibniz refers to the internal activity of substances as their primitive active forces. Defining substance in terms of activity is important to Leibniz for several reasons. For one, this position is of a piece with his contention that the activity of corporeal entities is grounded in that of incorporeal entities. In order to play this role, incorporeal monads must themselves be active. More importantly, Leibniz broaches the discussion of substance in the Discourse on Metaphysics with the goal of differentiating the actions of God from those of creatures. In arguing that each substance has its own primitive active force, Leibniz distances himself both from Spinoza’s monism and Malebranche’s occasionalism, the former holding that individual things are not themselves substances but rather modes of a single divine substance, and the latter invoking God’s power to explain the ordinary doings of creatures. To Leibniz, each of these positions insufficiently appreciates that each substance is complete and active in itself. For, were created substances to lack activity, there would be no distinction between actual, created substances and the possible yet uncreated substances in God’s mind, a modal distinction central to Leibniz’s theodicy.

c. Causality and Pre-Established Harmony

If each substance is complete in itself and requires no other substance to be understood, it follows that every finite substance is causally independent of all save God. Each created substance is, as Leibniz says, “like a world apart” (DM 14). But how can this be? How can Alexander defeat Darius without being related to, and thus in a sense dependent on, Darius? More broadly, how can Leibniz square his “world apart” language with our experience of living in a world with a plethora of cause and effect relationships between substances?

Leibniz responds to these questions by offering a unique theory of causal interaction, which he calls at different points either the theory of pre-established harmony or the hypothesis of concomitance. The theory holds that although no two substances directly influence each other, they can express each other, that is, the activity of one can be reflected in the concept of the other. Alexander, we typically say, caused Darius’ death. Leibniz does not object to this kind of causal attribution, but insists that at the metaphysical level, what we call causality amounts to no more than this: it is in the nature of Alexander to be he who defeats Darius and it is likewise in the nature of Darius to be him defeated by Alexander. These two independent substances, as Leibniz puts it, “mirror” each other, so that at the exact moment it can be predicated of Alexander that he is the vanquisher of Darius, it can likewise be predicated of Darius that he is the victim of Alexander.

Hence, although each substance is “like a world apart,” substances form a common world by mirroring, or expressing, one another. God ordains at the moment of creation—in Leibniz’s terms he “preestablishes”—that the perceptions of all creatures in the world harmonize with one another, that there is strict alignment so that at the moment I perceive myself as tapping my friend on the shoulder, she perceives herself as being tapped. Leibniz is fond of likening the relationship between substances to that between two perfectly synchronized clocks which remain aligned despite never touching each other. Causal interaction is no more than what we find in these clocks, the harmonized activity of independent entities. Leibniz famously describes independent monads as “windowless,” neither letting in any outside influence nor issuing any influence (M 7). This is the Leibnizian universe: windowless monads in pre-established harmony.

The theory of pre-established harmony includes the rather strong claim that each substance is harmonized with all other substances in the world. This must be the case if the substances are to form a common world with a common history, since mutual expression is the only possible relation between independent substances. Does this mean that my concept expresses the nature of even a fish living thousands of years ago? In a word, yes. Though Alexander and Darius express each other much more distinctly than I express the ancient fish, my concept must bear traces of the existence of that fish since we are members of a common world. This might seem fantastical, even absurd, but if one considers how much one’s own experience reflects the activities and efforts of one’s predecessors, and how much their activities were constrained by their natural environment, then perhaps one can begin to appreciate Leibniz’s insight that every single substance bears traces of, or faintly expresses, the whole universe, past, present, and future.

Leibniz’s explanation of causality via pre-established harmony and mutual expression has led some commentators to accuse Leibniz of what they call the “mirroring problem.” They object that if substance A expresses the essence of all others, yet these in turn express substance A, then the world is like a hall of mirrors which reflect one another but no concrete images. In this scenario, the concept of any given substance is not complete, as Leibniz would hold, but empty. Although this line of objection points to some of the complexities and potential difficulties in the theory of pre-established harmony, it merits mention that Leibniz sees each substance as fundamentally mirroring God. “It can even be said that every substance bears in some way the character of God’s infinite wisdom and omnipotence and imitates him as much as it is capable” (DM 9). Stating that each substance reflects God’s essence, while also mirroring all other substances, does not directly respond to the mirroring problem. Noting that each substance reflects God’s essence by virtue of its own internal individuating activity perhaps provides a more satisfying response, and it is likely that Leibniz’s solution to the mirroring problem lies in this direction.

d. Idealism                                                                      

Leibniz’s defense of incorporeal monads as the foundation of the physical world, his notion of substance as a complete concept, and his account of causality via pre-established harmony all contribute to Leibniz’s brand of idealism. By idealism, we mean the thesis that nothing exists in the world but minds and their ideas. As Leibniz summarizes his idealism: “There is nothing in the world but simple substances and in them perception and appetite” (AG 181).

By perception, Leibniz means the “passing state which involves and represents a multitude in the unity or in the simple substance” (M 14). Since each substance is metaphysically complete in itself and “like a world apart,” all changes in its state arise spontaneously, that is, without the intervention of other substances. Yet since each substance mirrors all others, it must contain a multiplicity of representations within itself. The sequence of spontaneous representations is what Leibniz calls perception. Importantly, Leibniz posits that all beings in the world perceive. This is yet another consequence of the fact that mutual representation is the only relation between monads in pre-established harmony. What distinguishes rational, conscious minds from all other substances is not perception, but apperception, or the ability to reflect on their mental processes.

Of appetite, Leibniz writes: “The action of the internal principle which brings about the change or passage from one perception to another can be called appetition; it is true that the appetite cannot always completely reach the whole perception toward which it tends, but it always obtains something of it. And reaches new perceptions” (M 15). The best analogy here is perhaps a mathematical function, where appetite is the analogue to the function equation, or the law of the series, and where each perception represents a discrete value. Leibniz’s point is that each substance has an orientation which defines it and which governs the transition between perceptions. This does not mean that each individual can fully choose or determine the sequence of its perceptions, since it is constrained by the need to faithfully represent the activity of other substances. Appetite does indicate, however, that there is a striving or tendency unique to each substance which shapes the manner in which it reflects the world. Hence Leibniz describes substances as so many distinct “viewpoints” on the universe (DM 14; M 57).

In composite substances, such as living animals whose various parts contribute to the well-being of the entire organism, simple monads unite under the direction of a dominant monad (M 70). Each monad retains its substantial independence, but living organisms display an especially high level of intermonadic harmony. Though Leibniz does not define in detail the operations of dominant monads, these monads must at least subsume others under their own internal principles or appetites. The activity of subordinate monads thereby serves the goals of the dominant monad. Conversely, subordinate monads must have particularly strong bearing on the perceptions of dominant monads, being, as it were, extensions of it. “There is nothing in the world but simple substances, and in them perception and appetite” may sound like a simple statement, but its simplicity should not mask the manifold degrees of coordination between the perceptions and appetites of monads.

e. The Nature of Body

It follows from Leibniz’s idealism that bodies are phenomenal. In other words, the physical world is the perception of perceiving monads. Leibniz is at pains, however, to insist that his system makes bodies “well-founded phenomena” (phenomena bene fundata). By this Leibniz means that bodies are not arbitrary perceptions lacking veracity. The pre-established harmony among all substances establishes a common realm of truth. Our perceptions thus provide us with knowledge of reality and serves as the starting point for empirical science.

Although “well-founded phenomena” might seem an empty expression within an idealist framework, it gains meaning from Leibniz’s commitment to the principle of sufficient reason, that is, the principle that nothing happens without reason or cause. For Leibniz, God’s rational ordering of creation certifies the reliability of sense perception, since God—the most rational of all minds—cannot do anything without having a reason for doing so. It would be arbitrary of God to give me this particular set of perceptions instead of some other set if it were not the case that my perceptions have some basis in other existing substances (NE 56). The thoroughgoing rational design of the world ensures that my perceptions indeed reflect the true order of things.

Defining bodies as “well-founded phenomena” leaves open the question of the relation of an individual’s mind to his own body. After all, my experience of my body seems qualitatively different than my perception of other things in the world. My arm, for example, moves upwards when I wish to remove my hat. Other bodies do not respond to my will in a like manner. Leibniz again invokes his theory of pre-established harmony to explain this apparent interaction between one’s mental and bodily states.

When I wish to raise my arm, it is precisely at the moment when everything is arranged in the body so as to carry this out, in such a manner that the body moves by virtue of its own laws; although it happens through the admirable but unfailing harmony between things that these things conspire towards that end precisely at the moment when the will is inclined to it, since God took it into consideration in advance, when he made his decision about the succession of all things in the universe. (LA 92)

Leibniz explains that God has arranged the world such that one’s mind and body do not directly influence each other, but nevertheless correspond perfectly at all moments. Leibniz is at pains to emphasize that the mind does not directly move the body because he wants to preserve the integrity of physics. Modern physics, relying on the principles of inertia and the conservation of force, requires that the motion of bodies be explained by other bodies. If minds directly influenced bodies, force could be added to the world at any time, and neither the principle of inertia nor the principle of conservation would hold. What causes the motion of my arm are the electrical impulses and synapses of my nervous system. The parallels between our desires and our bodily movements are instances not of interaction, but of harmony.

It is important to note that Leibniz sees the pre-established harmony between mind and body as following from his general theory of substance. Since minds are substantial and bodies phenomenal, my body is in one sense just a particularly distinct perception of my mind. In this sense, one’s perception of one’s body is not qualitatively different from one’s experience of other phenomena. Taking up Leibniz’s description of monads as various “viewpoints” on the universe, perhaps we can liken the body to one’s viewfinder, one’s lens on the universe, so long as we do not take the metaphor too literally by treating the body as an independent substance.

Though Leibniz adopts the language of “well-founded phenomena” to characterize bodies, scholars have debated the extent to which Leibniz’s idealism entails phenomenalism. The debate, put one way, is whether Leibniz makes bodies so “well-founded” that they have more reality than the term phenomena suggests. There is some consensus around the idea that Leibniz does not fully reduce bodies to perceptions, à la Berkeley, since bodies are aggregates of substantially real monads. Less certain is whether the substantial reality of monads makes labeling Leibniz a phenomenalist less apt. Given Leibniz’s insistence that “there is nothing in the world but [incorporeal] simple substances and in them perception and appetite” (AG 181) and his own use of the term phenomena, it seems most likely that Leibniz did not wish to accord bodies of aggregated monads the same metaphysical status as the monads comprising them. In short, monads are substantial, bodies are phenomenal, and Leibnizian idealism entails phenomenalism.

f. Efficient and Final Causality

Leibniz’s retrieval of the notion of substantial form blossomed into his idealist, monadic metaphysics and theory of pre-established harmony. Pre-established harmony mandates that the activity of bodies be explained by other bodies, not by minds. In explaining the activities of bodies, Leibniz makes a second major effort at reconciling ancient and modern thought. He mounts a defense of the utility of final causes in physics.

Aristotle distinguished between four causes, or four ways of accounting for the being of a thing. Philosophers of the 17th century found particularly objectionable the idea of final cause. The final cause of something indicates its purpose or goal. For instance, one might claim that the final cause of a tree is to grow upwards and reproduce. Thinkers such as Descartes, Hobbes, and Spinoza rejected the utility of final causes in explanations of the physical world, much as they rejected the utility of formal causes, or substantial forms. They restricted physics to the study of efficient causes, mechanical accounts of bodies in motion. We explain the growth of tree by looking to nutrient transfer from roots to branches, the exchange of compounds in respiration, the means of reproduction. To the moderns, any mention of tree’s purpose belongs to poetry, not physics.

Leibniz is as committed to mechanical explanation as his contemporaries, yet he bucks the 17th century trend of discrediting final causes outright. He reconciles the two approaches by offering a doctrine of double explanation. For Leibniz, events in nature are subject to explanation by either efficient or final causes. Leibniz does not adhere strictly to the Aristotelian notion of final cause any more than he adheres to the Aristotelian notion of substantial form. What Leibniz realizes, however, is that consideration of the end state of a physical process can often have as much predictive power as consideration of the motive forces involved. In §22 of the Discourse on Metaphysics, Leibniz cites Fermat’s proof of the refraction law for light. Fermat derived the law by noting that light takes the easiest path, or the path of least resistance. In this sense, Fermat took note of the end or goal light rays achieve. By contrast, Descartes proved the same law solely by examining efficient causes, likening the refraction of light to bouncing tennis balls, and considering factors such as speed and mass. The refraction of light, Leibniz observes, can be explained and predicted under two separate causal paradigms.

Leibniz’s development of the calculus aids him greatly in his defense of final causes. Using what we would today call the variational calculus, Leibniz can show that change in nature happens at optimal points where the derivative vanishes. Systems thus tend towards certain end states and analyzing these states can furnish us with significant predictive power. Calculus permits Leibniz to tie discussions of final cause to mathematics, not poetics.

Although Leibniz finds both efficient and final causal explanations acceptable, he insists that they be kept separate. We ought not to invoke discussions of purpose simply when we lack a sufficient mechanical explanation. Final causes do not fill the gaps in our understanding of efficient causes; they provide another method of investigation entirely. Leibniz favors explanations by efficient causes, to be sure, as they open up great possibilities for engineering. Still, he considers either method a legitimate account of the world. Efficient causes, Leibniz likes to say, show us God’s power; final causes, by bringing to light the directedness and efficiency of nature, reveal God’s wisdom.

4. Theodicy

a. Leibniz’s Project

Leibniz ranks peace of mind as “the greatest cause of [his] philosophizing” (L 148). Central to Leibniz’s efforts to secure peace of mind is the thesis that we live in the best of all possible worlds, a position now commonly called Leibnizian optimism. Leibniz reasons that if we can assure ourselves that God acts in the best of all possible ways, then we can trust God’s justice and have true peace of mind. Of course, it is by no means self-evident that our world, which includes suffering and evil, is compatible with divine justice, nor is it self-evident what criteria could certify the world as “the best of all possible.” Leibniz thus devotes much argument to defending divine justice and coins the term “theodicy”—from the Greek words for God (theós) and justice (díkē)—to describe this project.

b. God

The thesis that God acts in the best of all possible ways follows from the notion of God as “an absolutely perfect being” (DM 1). Leibniz accepts Descartes’ ontological proof for the existence of God, which proves the existence of God by way of our idea of perfection, with one caveat. To Leibniz, Descartes leaves his proof open to the objection that God does not exist because God cannot exist. “An absolutely perfect being,” this objection posits, is a logical impossibility. So, Leibniz sets out to demonstrate that a single being can possess all perfections in a logically consistent manner. He bolsters the ontological proof by grounding the demonstration for God’s actuality in a demonstration of God’s possibility.

Leibniz clarifies what he means by “perfection” by stipulating that those properties incapable of a highest degree do not qualify as perfections. The “greatest of all numbers” is a contradiction, as is the “greatest of all figures,” since number and magnitude are infinitely continuous quantities. However, there is nothing inherently contradictory in “the highest degree of knowledge” or “the highest degree of power,” so omniscience and omnipotence are rightly considered divine perfections (DM 1). We can say a being possesses limitless knowledge and power without predicating meaningless, impossible attributes of God. Importantly for the purposes of an ontological proof, existence qualifies as perfection under Leibniz’s definition.

Leibniz argues for the compatibility of all perfections by further stipulating that by “perfection” he means a simple, positive quality (L 167). Once we recognize that perfections are simple qualities, Leibniz believes we easily arrive at the conclusion that there is nothing inherently contradictory in the idea of a perfect being. For, were two perfections incompatible, this fact would be evident either immediately or through an analysis of the perfections in question. In the case of perfections like knowledge and power, no immediate incompatibility presents itself. Yet, because these qualities are simple, they cannot be broken down into components which might be shown incompatible. Since the incompatibility of perfections can be shown neither in itself, nor through demonstration, Leibniz concludes that God is a logically possible being. And—following the logic of the ontological proof—if possible, God is necessary.

Leibniz does not disallow other, a posteriori proofs for God’s existence. To the contrary, he employs several such proofs in his writings. Since it turns so much on the idea of perfection, however, his defense of the ontological proof holds a special place in his theodicy and thus in his philosophy as a whole.

c. Possible Worlds and Optimism

As an absolutely perfect being, God acts in the most perfect fashion. To understand what this means for an account of creation and a defense of God’s justice, Leibniz turns to the idea of possible worlds. A possible world is any set of possible substances whose attributes are mutually consistent, or compatible, with one another. Monads whose mutual existence would not entail contradictions are said to be compossible and thus potential members of a common world. God, in his omniscience, surveys an infinite number of compossible sets of substances and chooses to create the optimal, or best possible, world

What characterizes the best possible world? By what criteria does God make his selection? In the Discourse on Metaphysics, Leibniz writes that God selects that world which most effectively balances simplicity of means with richness of effects (DM 5). He likens God to a skilled architect who best employs the space and resources available to him, or a skilled geometer who finds the most elegant solution to a problem. Simplicity of means requires that there be order, efficiency, continuity, and intelligibility in the world. Richness of effects requires the maximization of both metaphysical and moral goodness. Metaphysical goodness denotes the amount of essence or perfection in the world, in short, the extent to which various creatures in the world imitate God’s inexhaustible essence. Maximizing metaphysical goodness therefore requires, at the very least, the creation of a great variety of creatures. Moral goodness refers to the happiness of rational beings, particularly the perfection and advancement of their rational faculties.

Much scholarship is devoted to determining precisely how Leibniz sees richness and simplicity coinciding in the best possible world. The task of interpretation gains complexity from the fact that Leibniz also speaks of God optimizing beauty and harmony, and even at times suggests that the best possible world progresses continually in perfection over time. Despite the difficulties in interpretation, it is clear that at the very least rational beings must inhabit an intelligible world. The perfections of rational beings interfere with one another least and thus are maximally compossible. Rarely does the knowledge and virtue of one person prevent or disallow the knowledge and virtue of another. By contrast, the beauty of a mountain range does preclude the beauty of plains at a given space and time. Because rational beings are capable of knowing God and entering into relationship with him, they are most responsible for maximizing metaphysical and moral goodness in the world. The intelligible order of creation aids them in this by making knowledge of various phenomena accessible through simple hypotheses.

Crucially, the existence of suffering does not count as proof against our world as being the best possible. By Leibniz’s lights, the goodness of the world as a whole does not require that each aspect of the world be choice worthy in itself. Pain and suffering find their place in the best possible world as “necessary evils” in maximizing its overall goodness. Here, the question of God’s justice arises and the true importance of possible worlds for Leibniz’s theodicy comes to light. How can God will to create pain and suffering? Does creating these not compromise divine justice? Leibniz responds that the divine will desires only what is good. The divine intellect takes, as it were, this desire for the good and determines how best to actualize it. The construction of the best possible world is the work of the divine intellect, and no more a matter of God’s will than the solution to an algebra equation depends on my will. God, Leibniz asserts, antecedently wills the good and consequently wills the best. God never wills evils in themselves, and never compromises his perfection, goodness, or justice. He accepts evil and suffering only insofar as they contribute to the overall goodness of the best possible world.

The distinction between what follows from the divine will and what follows from the divine intellect ultimately provides Leibniz with a means of upholding God’s perfection, despite the imperfections of creation. Were the conditions of the optimal world determined not by the divine intellect, but rather by arbitrary fiat, God would be no more than a despot and we would have no objective standard by which to judge his actions best. Were pain and suffering objects of the divine will per se, God would be cruel and unworthy of love. In other words, Leibniz believes he safeguards divine perfection by explaining that God is neither injudicious in thought nor vicious in will in creating the world as it is. Thus, assuring ourselves of God’s goodness and perfection is vital because “one cannot love God without knowing his perfections” (T 54) and loving God provides more happiness and peace of mind than any other activity. “To love is to find pleasure in the happiness of another. We love God himself above all things because the pleasure which we experience in contemplating the most beautiful being of all is greater than any conceivable joy” (L 134).

Leibniz insists that his optimism provides grounds for true joy and peace of mind, not simply the kind of disaffected, “grin and bear it” acquiescence commonly associated with the Stoics and—as Leibniz sees it—championed by Spinoza and Descartes. God does not what he must, but what is best. Whether or not Leibniz offers any greater consolation than the Stoics is an open question. Yet Leibniz believes that even if one cannot see the purpose of suffering, one can gain some measure of joy by contemplating, and advancing in knowledge of, God’s perfection.

Furthermore, because the theory of pre-established harmony among substances requires that all monads be created or destroyed collectively, Leibniz defends the immortality of monads. What we consider “life” is an active state of perception and appetite; what we consider “death” is simply dormancy. Leibniz, not unlike other Christian thinkers before him, maintains the hope that God will compensate for evils suffered by individuals over the full course of their existence, even if the purpose of those evils is not evident during their natural lifespans.

d. Freedom and Necessity

Leibniz’s theodicy raises two weighty sets of questions regarding freedom. The first concerns God’s freedom in creating. If the divine intellect objectively determines the design of the best possible world, should we not conclude that God is determined to create just this world? Is the notion of the divine will not meaningless, compromising the theological concept of grace? The second set of questions concerns human freedom. Since each individual substance contains all that can ever be predicated of it, and since God surveys the activity and interrelations of all monads in selecting the best possible world, it would seem that the entire course of history is set before the creation of the world. Does this mean that the idea of free will—and along with it theological concepts such as sin and redemption—is meaningless?

Leibniz takes these questions seriously throughout his career. His reflections trace at least to his Confession of a Philosopher of 1672-3. Section 13 of 1686’s Discourse on Metaphysics, which explores freedom and necessity, spurs his lengthy correspondence with Antoine Arnauld. And in the Theodicy of 1710, Leibniz calls the “labyrinth of freedom and necessity” one of the most perplexing questions facing humankind.

Though far from the first thinker to confront this “labyrinth,” Leibniz’s original contribution lies in his distinction between two kinds of necessity. Truths whose contraries imply a contradiction Leibniz calls “necessary per se.” Among these truths governed by the principle of non-contradiction, Leibniz includes the laws of arithmetic, geometry, and logic. Because these truths cannot be otherwise, not even to the divine intellect, Leibniz posits that they hold in all possible worlds. He thus refers to propositions necessary per se as “eternal verities.”

Truths which are certain, but whose contrary does not imply contradiction, Leibniz terms “necessary ex hypothesi.” The sequence of events in the world is necessary in this way. It is logically possible to conceive of the world being otherwise than it is. We create fictionalized accounts of reality in novels and dramas all the time; these accounts are entirely consistent in themselves. Because events in the world can be imagined otherwise, Leibniz believes they are in themselves contingent (contingent per se). Nevertheless, events in the world necessarily happen as they do on the presumption of (ex hypothesi) God’s selection of the best possible world. While the created world could be otherwise than it is, the optimal world could not be. Truths necessary ex hypothesi are governed by the principle of sufficient reason: God has a reason, a cause for creating the world in this way, namely, his desire for the best.

Leibniz locates a second method of distinguishing truths necessary per se from truths contingent per se in their respective manners of demonstration. The truth of a claim necessary per se, Leibniz writes, can be demonstrated a priori in a finite analysis, a proof with a finite number of steps. Think of Euclid’s demonstrations of the principles of geometry. Proving the truth of a contingent proposition, by contrast, requires an infinite analysis. To explain a priori why a given proposition about the world is true, one would have to take into account its harmony with all the other substances in the world, as well as account for why this set of substances was chosen out of the infinite number of possible worlds. Explanation would literally proceed ad infinitum. This is not to say that contingent truths are unknowable. God’s infinite intellect can presumably handle an infinite analysis and we know contingent truths a posteriori through experience. Infinitude of an analysis is a formal property of certain demonstrations, one Leibniz thinks suffices to distinguish necessary ex hypothesi from necessary per se truths.

With the distinction between the two kinds of necessity, Leibniz attempts to maintain meaningful notions of both divine and human freedom. Since God has infinitely many options among possible worlds, he cannot be said to be required in creating. One might object that God’s benevolent nature constrains and determines his action by forcing God to select the best world his intellect can design. Leibniz, however, counters that acting in accord with one’s nature and for the sake of the best is true freedom. One is only determined when constrained by outside forces. That God’s own nature leads him to create the best from among possible worlds makes him all the more free and worthy of praise.

Whether Leibniz is licensed to speak of human freedom is a thornier issue. Kant, in his Critique of Practical Reason, famously scoffs that Leibniz grants human beings nothing more than “the freedom of a turnspit” which, “once it is wound up, also accomplishes its movements of itself” (I.3; 5:97). Kant reasons that Leibniz’s monads, like any good machine, simply execute what they are programmed to do. To an extent, Kant is right. Leibniz does not entertain a notion of “free will,” if by this one means arbitrary and completely undetermined choice. The principle of sufficient reason banishes arbitrary choice. Human beings act in accord with their own natures, choosing what they deem best. My individual essence provides the reason for what I do

Yet while rejecting a voluntarist conception of free will, Leibniz nevertheless speaks of human freedom. We might reconstruct Leibniz’s reasoning in three steps. First, with the modal distinction between the two kinds of necessity, Leibniz insists that human choices are not necessary in the strong sense. Each truth about monads and their history is logically contingent. Leibniz, therefore, is not a logical determinist. He is however, an ontological determinist, insofar as all events are necessary given the composition of the world. Nevertheless—and this is the second step—the fact that each substance is causally independent of all other created substances makes each monad spontaneous. Spontaneity, to reiterate, refers to the fact that each state of a created substance follows from its preceding state without the direct influence of other substances; in this sense, each substance is “free.” Still, spontaneity is not what most people mean by human freedom. Human freedom—step three—comes with the fact that rational beings can gain knowledge of the causal principles governing the sequence of events in the world. Acting with knowledge does not make one less determined, but does make one less passive. One feels less at the mercy of inalterable forces when one understands these forces and can appreciate the principles of God’s design. The idea that increased activity and knowledge make an individual free owes much more to the conception of freedom developed by the Stoics and revived in the 17th century by Spinoza than it owes to voluntarist and Protestant conceptions of free will. As Leibniz sees it, his is the only conception of freedom compatible with divine perfection and worldly optimism.

5. Epistemology

a. Ideas and Knowledge

Leibniz’s epistemology begins with the distinction between clear and obscure ideas. An idea is clear when it allows one to recognize the thing represented, obscure when it does not. For example, one may have seen a gerbil and thus have an idea of what a gerbil is. However, if the next time she encounters a small rodent she cannot tell whether it is a gerbil or a hamster, then she possesses only an obscure idea of “gerbil.” By contrast, when one’s idea suffices to reliably distinguish one kind of object from others, then the idea is clear.

Leibniz divides clear ideas into two classes: confused and distinct. A clear idea is also distinct when one can catalogue all the marks, or criteria, distinguishing that idea from others. The animal physiologist can differentiate and enumerate those characteristics common to all rodents and those unique to gerbils. A child with a pet gerbil might not be able to do so and thus would have a clear but confused idea. Leibniz believes our sensory ideas, such as those of color, are clear and confused. Though we reliably distinguish blue from red, we cannot necessarily spell out the marks or causes which make one object blue and another red. We perceive colors without explaining them.

Leibniz proceeds to further classify clear and distinct ideas as either adequate or inadequate. If possessing an adequate idea, one has clear and distinct knowledge not only of the idea in question, but also of all its component parts. One has clear and distinct knowledge “all the way down” to the primitive concepts which compose the idea. Leibniz admits that he is unsure if any human being possesses an adequate idea, but believes our arithmetical knowledge most nearly approaches adequacy. In all other cases, where one cannot carry out comprehensive analyses down to primitive concepts, one has clear, distinct, yet inadequate ideas.

At its highest reaches, knowledge is not only adequate, but also intuitive. Intuitive knowledge is both adequate and non-discursive. That is, one clearly and distinctly knows all the ingredients of an idea and grasps these simultaneously. As is the case with all adequate knowledge, intuitive knowledge seems more suited to divine knowers than to human knowers, as the latter cannot think about all the components of a complex concept at once.

One consequence of Leibniz’s taxonomy of knowledge is that it provides Leibniz with a means of explaining sense perception. Given Leibniz’s idealism, all that exists in the world are monads and their mental states. Bodies are phenomenal and therefore not sources of knowledge. What, then, is sense perception? Is there any real difference between sensation and intellection if all ideas follow spontaneously from a monad’s own concept, with no interaction between monads? Leibniz answers such questions by noting that what we commonly experience as sense perceptions are simply confused ideas. Even if they are clear, sense perceptions are necessarily confused. Though these perceptions arise spontaneously in the perceiving subject, they express the harmony between a given monad and all others; it is therefore impossible to enumerate all the contributing factors to any given sense perception, most of which fall below the threshold of consciousness (DM 33). With the category of clear and confused ideas, Leibniz can meaningfully retain the distinction between sensation and intellection without compromising the basic tenets of his idealism.

Leibniz’s approach to ideas and knowledge separates him in some key respects from his fellow 17th century rationalists. The division between distinctness and adequacy leads Leibniz to differentiate between nominal and real definitions. Nominal definitions include distinct knowledge; they sufficiently identify the defining marks of a concept. Yet they do not ensure that the concept is possible. It could be that a concept is internally inconsistent, a fact which would be revealed if one had adequate knowledge of all its parts. Real definitions account for the possibility of a thing, either by citing experience or through a priori demonstration. In his discussion of definition, Leibniz seeks to modify Hobbes’ strong nominalism in which all truth is dependent on the relationship between names and definitions. There is a higher level of knowledge than that contained in nominal definitions, one which accounts for possible existence in reality.

Hobbes is not Leibniz’s only rationalist target. Leibniz believes he improves upon Descartes’ maxim that all clearly and distinctly perceived ideas are true by delineating better criteria for clarity and distinctness. To Leibniz, Descartes construes clarity and distinctness as something like immediately perceived qualities, ripe for misevaluation.

b. Innate Ideas

In the New Essays on Human Understanding, Leibniz takes aim at Locke’s depiction of the mind as a tabula rasa, or blank tablet, needing external impressions to furnish it with the contents of its reasoning. In opposition to this conception of the mind and cognition, Leibniz affirms the existence of innate ideas. In one sense, Leibniz’s theory of substance obviously commits him to some conception of innate ideas. If monads have no “windows” through which they interact with other substances, then of course all their ideas must have an internal, innate origin.

But Leibniz does not rest his defense of innate ideas on his theory of substance. Rather, he advances fairly traditional epistemological arguments regarding the nature of deductive, a priori truths. Empirical knowledge can show that something is the case but cannot show that something is necessarily the case. The human mind, however, has knowledge of necessary truths, such as the laws of arithmetic and geometry. These necessary truths, which Leibniz calls “truths of reason,” are ideas whose opposite is impossible. They are the eternal truths which obtain in all possible worlds. Because truths of reason are known solely through the principle of non-contradiction and require no empirical data, Leibniz concludes that they are innate to the mind. Leibniz contrasts innate ideas with “truths of fact,” contingent truths whose opposite is possible and knowledge of which requires experience.

The theory of innate ideas does not imply that all minds have equal awareness of the truths of reason. Ideas are innate in us not as actualities, but “as inclinations, dispositions, tendencies, or natural potentialities” (NE 52). Accessing truths of reason requires effort. Yet the presence of innate ideas does incline us towards their discovery. In one particularly apt metaphor, Leibniz claims that rational minds are not like blank tablets, but like veined pieces of marble, disposed to be cut and polished in determinate ways.

c. Petites Perceptions

One of the more original elements of Leibniz’s epistemology is his theory of petites perceptions.

There are hundreds of indications leading us to conclude that at every moment there is in us an infinity of perceptions, unaccompanied by awareness or reflection; that is, of alterations in the soul itself, of which we are unaware because these impressions are either too minute and too numerous, or else too unvarying, so that they are not sufficiently distinctive on their own. But when they are combined with others they do nevertheless have their effect and make themselves felt, at least confusedly, within the whole. (NE 53)

Leibniz posits that at any given time, the mind has not only the thoughts of which it is aware, but also innumerable small, insensible perceptions, which he calls petites perceptions.

Leibniz wagers that there are “hundreds of indications” pointing to existence of petites perceptions. Regardless of whether this is hyperbole, there are at least a few good reasons Leibniz includes these perceptions in his theory. For one, petites perceptions follow from the theory of pre-established harmony, both the harmony between all substances and the harmony between mind and body. Each monad mirrors the activity of all others at all moments. This mirroring takes place via mutual representation. Since no mind, at any given moment, has conscious awareness of all other substances, mutual representation must be taking place at insensible levels via petites perceptions. Moreover, the pre-established harmony between mind and body requires that mental activity express and run parallel to bodily activity. However, one is often insensitive to one’s bodily processes. In order to maintain the perfect parallelism between body and mind, therefore, we must conclude that the mind has petites perceptions of the body’s activity.

Even more fundamentally, the existence of petites perceptions follows from Leibniz’s understanding of substance. It is of a piece with the thesis that “there is nothing in the world but simple substances and in them perception and appetite.” Activity, more specifically perception, is the mark of any substance. That the mind has petites perceptions explains how it remains active and substantial even in dreamless sleep or after death.

Petites perceptions also help to explain the workings of appetite. Appetite determines the transition from one perception to the next, a transition which oftentimes seems sudden and episodic. For instance, one might jump immediately from thinking of one’s mother to thinking of Beethoven’s fifth symphony. On its face, this transition violates the principle of continuity, which states that no discontinuous change occurs. Nature—including rational nature—makes no leaps, has no gaps. The theory of petites perceptions accounts for apparent leaps in perception. What appears a discontinuous change in thought is actually determined by the continuous workings and interactions of infinitely many insensible perceptions.

Finally, petites perceptions help to explain what is confused in a confused idea, particularly in sense perceptions. The difficulty in explaining all the marks of a sensation comes from the many petites perceptions which contribute to it. “These minute perceptions…constitute that je ne sais quoi, those flavors, those images of sensible qualities, vivid in the aggregate but confused as to the parts; those impressions which are made on us by the bodies around us and which involve the infinite; that connection each of us has with the rest of the universe” (NE 54-5).

d. Reflection, Memory, Selfhood

All substances are incorporeal and perceptive. For this reason, Leibniz understands all substances on analogy to human minds or souls. Leibniz reserves the proper use of the term “soul,” however, for higher order substances with particular cognitive capacities. Souls not only perceive, but also apperceive. That is, they not only perceive objects, but also think about and reflect on themselves. They have the added capacity to remember past perceptions. These abilities to reflect and remember provide souls with a sense of self, an understanding of the “I.” As a result, souls have moral identities. Moral identity goes beyond the substantial identity over time that all monads have; moral identity requires that one can remember his past actions, recognize himself as the selfsame individual over time, and therefore assume responsibility for his character.

Reflection and memory make souls not just moral beings, but intellectual beings as well. Leibniz observes that self-reflection serves as the starting point for all metaphysical and philosophical thinking. Each soul is, as it were, its own principal innate idea. Studying one’s own nature leads one to form and investigate fundamental metaphysical ideas. “In thinking of ourselves, we think of being, of substance, of the simple and the composite, of the immaterial, and of God himself, by conceiving that that which is limited in us is limitless in him. And these reflective acts furnish the principle objects of our reasonings” (M 30).

Because of their moral and intellectual capacities, Leibniz likens souls to “little divinities” (M 30). Leibniz expresses the near divinity of rationality rather poignantly in the Theodicy:

This portion of reason which we possess is a gift of God and consists in the natural light that has remained with us in the midst of corruption; thus it is in accordance with the whole, and it differs from that which is in God only as a drop of water differs from the ocean, or rather as the finite from the infinite. (T 169)

Though every substance reflects God and his plan for the cosmos, rational souls are mirrors of God in a heightened way, being able to understand the nature of things, reflect on God’s works, and ultimately enter into relationship with him (M 83-84).

6. Ethics

Of the traditional major content areas of philosophy, ethics is perhaps the only one to which Leibniz is generally not considered to have made significant contribution. Certainly he does not share the reputation as an ethicist enjoyed by early modern thinkers Spinoza, Hume, and Kant, nor does he share the influence in political philosophy had by Locke and Hobbes. Leibniz himself, however, took great interest in the ethical dimensions of his thought. He engaged in central debates of the day regarding the foundations of justice and the possibility of altruistic love. Furthermore, all his thinking has a clear ethical bent, with the peace of mind sought by his optimism a prime example of this. While Leibniz’s ethical contributions do not match his metaphysics in scope or originality, when it comes to a thinker as singular as Leibniz, this fact alone should not discourage inquiry into his ethics.

a. Intellect and Will

Leibniz’s approach to ethics is, broadly speaking, intellectualist in nature. That is, Leibniz sees moral goodness as increasing in line with knowledge. He defines will as “the inclination to do something in proportion to the good it contains” (T 139). Hence, the more knowledge one has of the goodness of a particular object or act, the better one’s will is directed. Loving and desiring the right kinds of things follows from proper understanding. Perfecting the intellect, in short, accomplishes the perfection of the will.

Perfecting the intellect also brings about happiness. “It is obvious,” Leibniz writes, “that the happiness of mankind consists in two things—to have the power, as far as permitted, to do what it wills and to know what, from the nature of things, ought to be willed. Of these, mankind has almost achieved the former; as to the latter, it has failed in that it is particularly impotent with respect to itself” (L130). Despite Leibniz’s dour diagnosis of humanity’s understanding of perfection, his prognosis is encouraging. He does not see happiness as particularly difficult to achieve. One need only pursue and acquire knowledge of the nature of things.

The close alliance Leibniz sees between intellect and will has the further consequence of ruling out indifference of equipoise, a topic of much debate in the 17th century At issue in discussions of this “indifference” is the question of whether one’s will can be in complete suspension when faced with two or more options, without inclination one way or another. The purported phenomenon of indifference of equipoise was taken at the time as evidence of the will’s independence from the intellect and even of its capacity for free, uncaused choice.

Leibniz rejects indifference of equipoise on grounds of the principle of sufficient reason. Uncaused events are incomprehensible; all events, including acts of the will, have some explanation. Here the deeper significance of Leibniz’s account of the will comes to light: one’s knowledge of the goodness of things provides the reason the will chooses as it does. Still, one might ask, could not the will be in equilibrium when faced with two objects of equal goodness? No. Per the principle of the identity of indiscernibles, each substance in the world has a unique complete concept which mirrors God and creation in a unique way; no two substances, no two states of affairs, are equivalent in goodness. One’s intellect and will therefore cannot respond identically to two different options. Though we may sometimes feel completely indifferent and unable to articulate the reasons for a choice, Leibniz insists that it would be a mistake to think of the choice as uncaused or of the will as uninclined. Infinitely many petites perceptions are at work in one’s mind at all times; much like machines, our movements are the result of all the tendencies and inclinations within us, even those of which we are unaware. Thus, we should not champion arbitrary choice by citing indifference of equipoise, but rather become freer, more self-aware moral beings through progress in knowledge.

b. Justice and Charity

Leibniz sees the study of justice as an a priori science of the good. There is, that is, an objective, rational basis for justice. Though Leibniz wrote much regarding the positive laws of states, he does not see positive law as the foundation of justice. He rejects the position that justice has no firmer foundation than the fiat of those in power, a position Leibniz often mentions in conjunction with Thrasymachus from Plato’s Republic but more pointedly associates with Samuel von Pufendorf and Thomas Hobbes. Taken to its logical conclusion, this position results in divine command theory: certain principles are just simply because God, the most powerful of all legislators, has posited they be so. For Leibniz, this line of thinking violates God’s perfection. God acts in the most perfect way and thus acts with good reason, not by arbitrary fiat. He is perfect not only in power, but also in wisdom. God’s perfect will follows upon his perfect intellect no less than the will of any rational being follows upon her intellect. The a priori, eternal standard of justice to which God himself adheres provides the basis for a theory of natural law.

Leibniz defines justice as the charity of the wise person. Though this may seem unique, or even odd, to those accustomed to seeing justice and charity contrasted, what is truly original in Leibniz’s rooting justice in charity is his very definition of charity, or love. In the 17th C., there were a series of debates regarding the possibility of disinterested love. Each creature, it would seem, acts to preserve and advance its own being. Hobbes and Spinoza employed the term conatus to refer to the striving each being has to persist in its own being and made it the foundation of their respective psychologies. On this view, one loves what one finds pleasing, that is, what one finds conducive to his own persistence. Love is reduced to a kind of egoism which, even where benevolent, nevertheless lacks an altruistic component.

Leibniz attempts to obviate the tension between egoism and altruism by defining love as taking pleasure in the happiness, or perfection, of another. With this definition, Leibniz does not deny the fundamental drive all creatures have for pleasure and self-interest, but ties it to altruistic concern for the well-being of others. The coincidence of altruism and self-interest defines love and captures the essence of justice. Justice is the charity of the wise person and the wise person, Leibniz goes on to say, loves all. Leibniz’s basic contention is that to be just is to show the love attended by insight that God shows. Ethics involves seeking the good of all in a prudent way, such that the good of each individual is pursued only insofar as it is compatible with the whole. One cannot love all when obtaining the happiness of one person at the expense of another’s, nor would this be desirable, since Leibniz believes we find more pleasure in harmony than discord. The kind of universal love demanded by Leibniz’s definition of justice is nurtured by reflection on the universal harmony between all things. Leibniz believes that appreciating the harmonious order of the cosmos can lead individuals to find pleasure in increasing the perfection and happiness of all who share in that order.

Leibniz’s definition of love also entails that loving God is the highest end of rational beings. If love is finding pleasure in the perfection of another, then loving an infinitely perfect being affords the greatest possible pleasure and happiness.

To love is to find pleasure in the happiness of another. We love God himself above all things because the pleasure which we experience in contemplating the most beautiful being of all is greater than any conceivable joy. (L 134)

Since the harmony of the world mirrors God’s perfection, Leibniz’s conception of justice does not place love of God at odds with love of others. We should take pleasure in perfection wherever we discern it. Justice as the charity of the wise person means that love of God and love of neighbor are one. By identifying justice with love of God and harmony between all, Leibniz brings to fruition the ethical implications of his metaphysical inquiries into God’s perfection and pre-established harmony. Ethics and metaphysics are, for Leibniz, never far apart.

7. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources: Leibniz Texts and Translations

The standard critical edition of Leibniz’s writings is G.W. Leibniz: Sämtliche Schriften und Briefe, edited by the Deutsche Akademie der Wissenschaften (Berlin: Academy Verlag, 1923- ). The Akademie edition is still in production. Other useful editions of Leibniz’s writings in their original languages are those of C. I. Gerhardt (Die Philosophischen Schriften von Leibniz. 7 vols. 1875-1890) and Ludovici Dutens (Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz: Opera Omnia. Hildesheim: Georg Olms Verlag, 1989).

References in this article to Leibniz’s works use the following abbreviations and translations:

AG     G.W. Leibniz: Philosophical Essays. Edited and translated by Roger Ariew and Daniel Garber. Indianapolis: Hackett, 1989.

DM      Discourse on Metaphysics, as translated by Ariew and Garber in G.W. Leibniz: Philosophical Essays. Passages from the Discourse are cited by section number.

G         Die Philosophischen Schriften von Leibniz. Edited by C.I. Gerhardt. Berlin. 7 vols. 1875-1890.

L        G.W. Leibniz: Philosophical Papers and Letters. Edited and translated by Leroy E. Loemker. 2nd ed. Dordrecht: Kluwer, 1989.

LA      The Leibniz-Arnauld Correspondence. Edited by H.T. Mason. Manchester: Manchester University Press, 1967.

M        Monadology, as translated by Ariew and Garber in G.W. Leibniz: Philosophical Essays. Passages from the Monadology are cited by section number.

NE       New Essays on Human Understanding. Edited by Peter Remnant and Jonathan Bennett. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996.

T          Theodicy: Essays on the Goodness of God, the Freedom of Man, and the Problem of Evil. Translated by E.M. Huggard. BiblioBazaar, 2007.

Other helpful collections of Leibniz’s writings in English include:

  • The Leibniz-Clarke Correspondence. Edited by H.G. Alexander. New York: Philosophical Library, 1956.
  • The Labyrinth of the Continuum: Writings on the Continuum Problem, 1672-1686. Edited by Richard W. T. Arthur. New Haven: Yale University Press, 2002.
  • The Leibniz-Des Bosses Correspondence. Edited by Brandon C. Look and Donald Rutherford. New Haven: Yale University Press, 2007.
  • Leibniz: Logical Papers. Edited by G.H.R. Parkinson. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1966.
  • De Summa Rerum: Metaphysical Papers, 1675-1676. Edited by G.H.R. Parkinson. New Haven: Yale University Press, 1992.
  • Leibniz: Political Writings. Edited by Patrick Riley. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1988.
  • Confessio Philosophi: Papers Concerning the Problem of Evil, 1671-1678. Edited by Robert C. Sleigh, Jr. New Haven: Yale University Press, 2005.
  • Leibniz and the Two Sophies: The Philosophical Correspondence. Edited by Lloyd Strickland. Toronto: Iter, Inc., 2011.
  • Leibniz’s ‘New System’ and Associated Contemporary Texts. Edited by R.S. Woolhouse and Richard Francks. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1997.

b. Secondary Sources

i. Introductory Texts

  • Antognazza, Maria Rosa. Leibniz: An Intellectual Biography. New York: Cambridge University Press, 2009.
  • Arthur, Richard T.W. Leibniz. Cambridge: Polity Press, 2014.
  • Jolley, Nicholas. Leibniz. New York: Routledge, 2005.
  • Perkins, Franklin. Leibniz: A Guide for the Perplexed. New York: Continuum, 2007.
  • Savile, Anthony. Routledge Guidebook to Leibniz and the Monadology.New York: Routledge, 2000.

ii. More Advanced Studies

  • Adams, Robert Merrihew. Leibniz: Determinist, Theist, Idealist. New York: Oxford University Press,  1994.
  • Garber, Daniel. Leibniz: Body, Substance, Monad. New York: Oxford University Press, 2009.
  • Ishiguro, Hidé. Leibniz’s Philosophy of Logic and Language. Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1975.
  • Mercer, Christia. Leibniz’s Metaphysics: Its Origins and Development. New York: Cambridge University Press, 2001.
  • Parkinson, G.H.R. Logic and Reality in Leibniz’s Metaphysics. Cambridge: Oxford University Press, 1965.
  • Rescher. Nicholas. Leibniz’s Metaphysics of Nature. Dordrecht: Reidel, 1981.
  • Riley, Patrick. Leibniz’s Universal Jurisprudence: Justice as the Charity of the Wise. Harvard University Press, 1996.
  • Rutherford, Donald. Leibniz and the Rational Order of Nature. New York: Cambridge University Press, 1995.
  • Sleigh, Robert C. Leibniz and Arnauld: A Commentary on their Correspondence. New Haven: Yale University Press, 1990.
  • Smith, Justin E.H. Divine Machines: Leibniz and the Sciences of Life. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 2011.
  • Strickland, Lloyd. Leibniz Reinterpreted. London: Continuum, 2006.
  • Wilson, Catherine. Leibniz’s Metaphysics: A Historical and Comparative Study. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1989.

iii. Collected Essays 

  • Brown, Stuart, ed. The Young Leibniz and his Philosophy (1646-76). Dordrecht: Kluwer, 1999.
  • Jorgensen and Newlands, eds. New Essays on Leibniz’s Theodicy. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2014.
  • Jolley, Nicholas, ed. The Cambridge Companion to Leibniz. edited by Nicholas Jolley. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1995.
  • Rutherford and Cover, eds. Leibniz: Nature and Freedom. New York: Oxford University Press, 2005.


Author Information

Edward W. Glowienka
Carroll College
U. S. A.

Socrates (469—399 B.C.E.)

SocratesSocrates is one of the few individuals whom one could say has so-shaped the cultural and intellectual development of the world that, without him, history would be profoundly different.  He is best known for his association with the Socratic method of question and answer, his claim that he was ignorant (or aware of his own absence of knowledge), and his claim that the unexamined life is not worth living, for human beings. He was the inspiration for Plato, the thinker widely held to be the founder of the Western philosophical tradition.  Plato in turn served as the teacher of Aristotle, thus establishing the famous triad of ancient philosophers: Socrates, Plato, and Aristotle.  Unlike other philosophers of his time and ours, Socrates never wrote anything down but was committed to living simply and to interrogating the everyday views and popular opinions of those in his home city of Athens.  At the age of 70, he was put to death at the hands of his fellow citizens on charges of impiety and corruption of the youth.  His trial, along with the social and political context in which occurred, has warranted as much treatment from historians and classicists as his arguments and methods have from philosophers.

This article gives an overview of Socrates: who he was, what he thought, and his purported method.  It is both historical and philosophical.  At the same time, it contains reflections on the difficult nature of knowing anything about a person who never committed any of his ideas to the written word.  Much of what is known about Socrates comes to us from Plato, although Socrates appears in the works of other ancient writers as well as those who follow Plato in the history of philosophy.  This article recognizes that finding the original Socrates may be impossible, but it attempts to achieve a close approximation.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography: Who was Socrates?
    1. The Historical Socrates
      1. Birth and Early Life
      2. Later Life and Trial
        1. The Peloponnesian War and the Threat to Democracy
        2. Greek Religion and Socrates’ Impiety
    2. The Socratic Problem: the Philosophical Socrates
      1. Origin of the Socratic Problem
      2. Aristophanes
      3. Xenophon
      4. Plato
      5. Aristotle
  2. Content: What does Socrates Think?
    1. Presocratic Philosophy and the Sophists
    2. Socratic Themes in Plato’s Apology
      1. Socratic Ignorance
      2. Priority of the Care of the Soul
      3. The Unexamined Life
    3. Other Socratic Positions and Arguments
      1. Unity of Virtue; All Virtue is Knowledge
      2. No One Errs Knowingly/No One Errs Willingly
      3. All Desire is for the Good
      4. It is Better to Suffer an Injustice Than to Commit One
      5. Eudaimonism
      6. Ruling is An Expertise
    4. Socrates the Ironist
  3. Method: How Did Socrates Do Philosophy?
    1. The Elenchus: Socrates the Refuter
      1. Topic
      2. Purpose
    2. Maieutic: Socrates the Midwife
    3. Dialectic: Socrates the Constructer
  4. Legacy: How Have Other Philosophers Understood Socrates?
    1. Hellenistic Philosophy
      1. The Cynics
      2. The Stoics
      3. The Skeptics
      4. The Epicureans
      5. The Peripatetics
    2. Modern Philosophy
      1. Hegel
      2. Kierkegaard
      3. Nietzsche
      4. Heidegger
      5. Gadamer
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Biography: Who was Socrates?

a. The Historical Socrates

i. Birth and Early Life

Socrates was born in Athens in the year 469 B.C.E. to Sophroniscus, a stonemason, and Phaenarete, a midwife.  His family was not extremely poor, but they were by no means wealthy, and Socrates could not claim that he was of noble birth like Plato.  He grew up in the political deme or district of Alopece, and when he turned 18, began to perform the typical political duties required of Athenian males.  These included compulsory military service and membership in the Assembly, the governing body responsible for determining military strategy and legislation.

In a culture that worshipped male beauty, Socrates had the misfortune of being born incredibly ugly.  Many of our ancient sources attest to his rather awkward physical appearance, and Plato more than once makes reference to it (Theaetetus 143e, Symposium, 215a-c; also Xenophon Symposium 4.19, 5.5-7 and Aristophanes Clouds 362).  Socrates was exophthalmic, meaning that his eyes bulged out of his head and were not straight but focused sideways.  He had a snub nose, which made him resemble a pig, and many sources depict him with a potbelly.  Socrates did little to help his odd appearance, frequently wearing the same cloak and sandals throughout both the day and the evening.  Plato’s Symposium (174a) offers us one of the few accounts of his caring for his appearance.

As a young man Socrates was given an education appropriate for a person of his station.  By the middle of the 5th century B.C.E., all Athenian males were taught to read and write. Sophroniscus, however, also took pains to give his son an advanced cultural education in poetry, music, and athletics.  In both Plato and Xenophon, we find a Socrates that is well versed in poetry, talented at music, and quite at-home in the gymnasium.  In accordance with Athenian custom, his father also taught him a trade, though Socrates did not labor at it on a daily basis.  Rather, he spent his days in the agora (the Athenian marketplace), asking questions of those who would speak with him.  While he was poor, he quickly acquired a following of rich young aristocrats—one of whom was Plato—who particularly enjoyed hearing him interrogate those that were purported to be the wisest and most influential men in the city.

Socrates was married to Xanthippe, and according to some sources, had a second wife.  Most suggest that he first married Xanthippe, and that she gave birth to his first son, Lamprocles.  He is alleged to have married his second wife, Myrto, without dowry, and she gave birth to his other two sons, Sophroniscus and Menexenus.  Various accounts attribute Sophroniscus to Xanthippe, while others even suggest that Socrates was married to both women simultaneously because of a shortage of males in Athens at the time.  In accordance with Athenian custom, Socrates was open about his physical attraction to young men, though he always subordinated his physical desire for them to his desire that they improve the condition of their souls.

Socrates fought valiantly during his time in the Athenian military.  Just before the Peloponnesian War with Sparta began in 431 B.C.E, he helped the Athenians win the battle of Potidaea (432 B.C.E.), after which he saved the life of Alcibiades, the famous Athenian general.  He also fought as one of 7,000 hoplites aside 20,000 troops at the battle of Delium (424 B.C.E.) and once more at the battle of Amphipolis (422 B.C.E.).  Both battles were defeats for Athens.

Despite his continued service to his city, many members of Athenian society perceived Socrates to be a threat to their democracy, and it is this suspicion that largely contributed to his conviction in court.  It is therefore imperative to understand the historical context in which his trial was set.

ii. Later Life and Trial

1. The Peloponnesian War and the Threat to Democracy

Between 431—404 B.C.E. Athens fought one of its bloodiest and most protracted conflicts with neighboring Sparta, the war that we now know as the Peloponnesian War.  Aside from the fact that Socrates fought in the conflict, it is important for an account of his life and trial because many of those with whom Socrates spent his time became either sympathetic to the Spartan cause at the very least or traitors to Athens at worst.  This is particularly the case with those from the more aristocratic Athenian families, who tended to favor the rigid and restricted hierarchy of power in Sparta instead of the more widespread democratic distribution of power and free speech to all citizens that obtained in Athens.  Plato more than once places in the mouth of his character Socrates praise for Sparta (Protagoras 342b, Crito 53a; cf. Republic 544c in which most people think the Spartan constitution is the best).  The political regime of the Republic is marked by a small group of ruling elites that preside over the citizens of the ideal city.

There are a number of important historical moments throughout the war leading up to Socrates’ trial that figure in the perception of him as a traitor.  Seven years after the battle of Amphipolis, the Athenian navy was set to invade the island of Sicily, when a number of statues in the city called “herms”, dedicated to the god Hermes, protector of travelers, were destroyed.  Dubbed the ‘Mutilation of the Herms’ (415 B.C.E.), this event engendered not only a fear of those who might seek to undermine the democracy, but those who did not respect the gods.  In conjunction with these crimes, Athens witnessed the profanation of the Eleusinian mysteries, religious rituals that were to be conducted only in the presence of priests but that were in this case performed in private homes without official sanction or recognition of any kind.  Amongst those accused and persecuted on suspicion of involvement in the crimes were a number of Socrates’ associates, including Alcibiades, who was recalled from his position leading the expedition in Sicily.  Rather than face prosecution for the crime, Alcibiades escaped and sought asylum in Sparta.

Though Alcibiades was not the only of Socrates’ associates implicated in the sacrilegious crimes (Charmides and Critias were suspected as well), he is arguably the most important.  Socrates had by many counts been in love with Alcibiades and Plato depicts him pursuing or speaking of his love for him in many dialogues (Symposium 213c-d, Protagoras 309a, Gorgias 481d, Alcibiades I 103a-104c, 131e-132a).  Alcibiades is typically portrayed as a wandering soul (Alcibiades I 117c-d), not committed to any one consistent way of life or definition of justice.  Instead, he was a kind of cameleon-like flatterer that could change and mold himself in order to please crowds and win political favor (Gorgias 482a).  In 411 B.C.E., a group of citizens opposed to the Athenian democracy led a coup against the government in hopes of establishing an oligarchy.  Though the democrats put down the coup later that year and recalled Alcibiades to lead the Athenian fleet in the Hellespont, he aided the oligarchs by securing for them an alliance with the Persian satraps.  Alcibiades therefore did not just aid the Spartan cause but allied himself with Persian interests as well.  His association with the two principal enemies of Athens reflected poorly on Socrates, and Xenophon tells us that Socrates’ repeated association with and love for Alcibiades was instrumental in the suspicion that he was a Spartan apologist.

Sparta finally defeated Athens in 404 B.C.E., just five years before Socrates’ trial and execution.  Instead of a democracy, they installed as rulers a small group of Athenians who were loyal to Spartan interests.  Known as “The Thirty” or sometimes as the “Thirty Tyrants”, they were led by Critias, a known associate of Socrates and a member of his circle.  Critias’ nephew Charmides, about whom we have a Platonic dialogue of the same name, was also a member.  Though Critias put forth a law prohibiting Socrates from conducting discussions with young men under the age of 30, Socrates’ earlier association with him—as well as his willingness to remain in Athens and endure the rule of the Thirty rather than flee—further contributed to the growing suspicion that Socrates was opposed to the democratic ideals of his city.

The Thirty ruled tyrannically—executing a number of wealthy Athenians as well as confiscating their property, arbitrarily arresting those with democratic sympathies, and exiling many others—until they were overthrown in 403 B.C.E. by a group of democratic exiles returning to the city.  Both Critias and Charmides were killed and, after a Spartan-sponsored peace accord, the democracy was restored.  The democrats proclaimed a general amnesty in the city and thereby prevented politically motivated legal prosecutions aimed at redressing the terrible losses incurred during the reign of the Thirty.  Their hope was to maintain unity during the reestablishment of their democracy.

One of Socrates’ main accusers, Anytus, was one of the democratic exiles that returned to the city to assist in the overthrow of the Thirty.  Plato’s Meno, set in the year 402 B.C.E., imagines a conversation between Socrates and Anytus in which the latter argues that any citizen of Athens can teach virtue, an especially democratic view insofar as it assumes knowledge of how to live well is not the restricted domain of the esoteric elite or privileged few.  In the discussion, Socrates argues that if one wants to know about virtue, one should consult an expert on virtue (Meno 91b-94e).  The political turmoil of the city, rebuilding itself as a democracy after nearly thirty years of destruction and bloodshed, constituted a context in which many citizens were especially fearful of threats to their democracy that came not from the outside, but from within their own city.

While many of his fellow citizens found considerable evidence against Socrates, there was also historical evidence in addition to his military service for the case that he was not just a passive but an active supporter of the democracy.  For one thing, just as he had associates that were known oligarchs, he also had associates that were supporters of the democracy, including the metic family of Cephalus and Socrates’ friend Chaerephon, the man who reported that the oracle at Delphi had proclaimed that no man was wiser than Socrates.  Additionally, when he was ordered by the Thirty to help retrieve the democratic general Leon from the island of Salamis for execution, he refused to do so.  His refusal could be understood not as the defiance of a legitimately established government but rather his allegiance to the ideals of due process that were in effect under the previously instituted democracy.  Indeed, in Plato’s Crito, Socrates refuses to escape from prison on the grounds that he lived his whole life with an implied agreement with the laws of the democracy (Crito 50a-54d).  Notwithstanding these facts, there was profound suspicion that Socrates was a threat to the democracy in the years after the end of the Peloponnesian War.  But because of the amnesty, Anytus and his fellow accusers Meletus and Lycon were prevented from bringing suit against Socrates on political grounds.  They opted instead for religious grounds.

2. Greek Religion and Socrates’ Impiety

Because of the amnesty the charges made against Socrates were framed in religious terms.  As recounted by Diogenes Laertius (1.5.40), the charges were stated as follows: “Socrates does criminal wrong by not recognizing the gods that the city recognizes, and furthermore by introducing new divinities; and he also does criminal wrong by corrupting the youth” (other accounts: Xenophon Memorabilia I.I.1 and Apology 11-12, Plato, Apology 24b and Euthyphro 2c-3b).  Many people understood the charge about corrupting the youth to signify that Socrates taught his subversive views to others, a claim that he adamantly denies in his defense speech by claiming that he has no wisdom to teach (Plato, Apology 20c) and that he cannot be held responsible for the actions of those that heard him speak (Plato, Apology 33a-c).

It is now customary to refer to the principal written accusation on the deposition submitted to the Athenian court as an accusation of impiety, or unholiness.  Rituals, ceremonies, and sacrifices that were officially sanctioned by the city and its officials marked ancient Greek religion.  The sacred was woven into the everyday experience of citizens who demonstrated their piety by correctly observing their ancestral traditions.  Interpretation of the gods at their temples was the exclusive domain of priests appointed and recognized by the city.  The boundary and separation between the religious and the secular that we find in many countries today therefore did not obtain in Athens.  A religious crime was consequently an offense not just against the gods, but also against the city itself.

Socrates and his contemporaries lived in a polytheistic society, a society in which the gods did not create the world but were themselves created.  Socrates would have been brought up with the stories of the gods recounted in Hesiod and Homer, in which the gods were not omniscient, omnibenevolent, or eternal, but rather power-hungry super-creatures that regularly intervened in the affairs of human beings.  One thinks for example of Aphrodite saving Paris from death at the hands of Menelaus (Homer, Iliad 3.369-382) or Zeus sending Apollo to rescue the corpse of Sarpedon after his death in battle (Homer, Iliad 16.667-684).  Human beings were to fear the gods, sacrifice to them, and honor them with festivals and prayers.

Socrates instead seemed to have a conception of the divine as always benevolent, truthful, authoritative, and wise.  For him, divinity always operated in accordance with the standards of rationality.  This conception of divinity, however, dispenses with the traditional conception of prayer and sacrifice as motivated by hopes for material payoff.  Socrates’ theory of the divine seemed to make the most important rituals and sacrifices in the city entirely useless, for if the gods are all good, they will benefit human beings regardless of whether or not human beings make offerings to them.  Jurors at his trial might have thought that, without the expectation of material reward or protection from the gods, Socrates was disconnecting religion from its practical roots and its connection with the civic identity of the city.

While Socrates was critical of blind acceptance of the gods and the myths we find in Hesiod and Homer, this in itself was not unheard of in Athens at the time.  Solon, Xenophanes, Heraclitus, and Euripides had all spoken against the capriciousness and excesses of the gods without incurring penalty.  It is possible to make the case that Socrates’ jurors might not have indicted him solely on questioning the gods or even of interrogating the true meaning of piety.  Indeed, there was no legal definition of piety in Athens at the time, and jurors were therefore in a similar situation to the one in which we find Socrates in Plato’s Euthyphro, that is, in need of an inquiry into what the nature of piety truly is.  What seems to have concerned the jurors was not only Socrates’ challenge to the traditional interpretation of the gods of the city, but his seeming allegiance to an entirely novel divine being, unfamiliar to anyone in the city.

This new divine being is what is known as Socrates’ daimon.  Though it has become customary to think of a daimon as a spirit or quasi-divinity (for example, Symposium 202e-203a), in ancient Greek religion it was not solely a specific class of divine being but rather a mode of activity, a force that drives a person when no particular divine agent can be named (Burkett, 180).  Socrates claimed to have heard a sign or voice from his days as a child that accompanied him and forbid him to pursue certain courses of action (Plato, Apology 31c-d, 40a-b, Euthydemus 272e-273a, Euthyphro 3b, Phaedrus 242b, Theages 128-131a, Theaetetus 150c-151b, Rep 496c; Xenophon, Apology 12, Memorabilia 1.1.3-5).  Xenophon adds that the sign also issued positive commands (Memorablia 1.1.4, 4.3.12, 4.8.1, Apology 12).  This sign was accessible only to Socrates, private and internal to his own mind.  Whether Socrates received moral knowledge of any sort from the sign is a matter of scholarly debate, but beyond doubt is the strangeness of Socrates’ insistence that he took private instructions from a deity that was unlicensed by the city.  For all the jurors knew, the deity could have been hostile to Athenian interests.  Socrates’ daimon was therefore extremely influential in his indictment on the charge of worshipping new gods unknown to the city (Plato, Euthyphro 3b, Xenophon, Memorabilia I.1.2).

Whereas in Plato’s Apology Socrates makes no attempt to reconcile his divine sign with traditional views of piety, Xenophon’s Socrates argues that just as there are those who rely on birdcalls and receive guidance from voices, so he too is influenced by his daimon.  However, Socrates had no officially sanctioned religious role in the city.  As such, his attempt to assimilate himself to a seer or necromancer appointed by the city to interpret divine signs actually may have undermined his innocence, rather than help to establish it.  His insistence that he had direct, personal access to the divine made him appear guilty to enough jurors that he was sentenced to death.

b. The Socratic Problem: the Philosophical Socrates

The Socratic problem is the problem faced by historians of philosophy when attempting to reconstruct the ideas of the original Socrates as distinct from his literary representations.  While we know many of the historical details of Socrates’ life and the circumstances surrounding his trial, Socrates’ identity as a philosopher is much more difficult to establish.  Because he wrote nothing, what we know of his ideas and methods comes to us mainly from his contemporaries and disciples.

There were a number of Socrates’ followers who wrote conversations in which he appears.  These works are what are known as the logoi sokratikoi, or Socratic accounts.  Aside from Plato and Xenophon, most of these dialogues have not survived.  What we know of them comes to us from other sources.  For example, very little survives from the dialogues of Antisthenes, whom Xenophon reports as one of Socrates’ leading disciples.  Indeed, from polemics written by the rhetor Isocrates, some scholars have concluded that he was the most prominent Socratic in Athens for the first decade following Socrates’ death.  Diogenes Laertius (6.10-13) attributes to Antisthenes a number of views that we recognize as Socratic, including that virtue is sufficient for happiness, the wise man is self-sufficient, only the virtuous are noble, the virtuous are friends, and good things are morally fine and bad things are base.

Aeschines of Sphettus wrote seven dialogues, all of which have been lost.  It is possible for us to reconstruct the plots of two of them: the Alcibiades—in which Socrates shames Alcibiades into admitting he needs Socrates’ help to be virtuous—and the Aspasia—in which Socrates recommends the famous wife of Pericles as a teacher for the son of Callias.  Aeschines’ dialogues focus on Socrates’ ability to help his interlocutor acquire self-knowledge and better himself.

Phaedo of Elis wrote two dialogues.  His central use of Socrates is to show that philosophy can improve anyone regardless of his social class or natural talents.  Euclides of Megara wrote six dialogues, about which we know only their titles.  Diogenes Laertius reports that he held that the good is one, that insight and prudence are different names for the good, and that what is opposed to the good does not exist.  All three are Socratic themes.  Lastly, Aristippus of Cyrene wrote no Socratic dialogues but is alleged to have written a work entitled To Socrates.

The two Socratics on whom most of our philosophical understanding of Socrates depends are Plato and Xenophon.  Scholars also rely on the works of the comic playwright Aristophanes and Plato’s most famous student, Aristotle.

i. Origin of the Socratic Problem

The Socratic problem first became pronounced in the early 19th century with the influential work of Friedrich Schleiermacher.  Until this point, scholars had largely turned to Xenophon to identify what the historical Socrates thought.  Schleiermacher argued that Xenophon was not a philosopher but rather a simple citizen-soldier, and that his Socrates was so dull and philosophically uninteresting that, reading Xenophon alone, it would be difficult to understand the reputation accorded Socrates by so many of his contemporaries and nearly all the schools of philosophy that followed him.  The better portrait of Socrates, Schleiermacher claimed, comes to us from Plato.

Though many scholars have since jettisoned Xenophon as a legitimate source for representing the philosophical views of the historical Socrates, they remain divided over the reliability of the other three sources.  For one thing, Aristophanes was a comic playwright, and therefore took considerable poetic license when scripting his characters.  Aristotle, born 15 years after Socrates’ death, hears about Socrates primarily from Plato. Plato himself wrote dialogues or philosophical dramas, and thus cannot be understood to be presenting his readers with exact replicas or transcriptions of conversations that Socrates actually had.  Furthermore, many scholars think that Plato’s so-called middle and late dialogues do not present the views of the historical Socrates.

We therefore see the difficult nature of the Socratic problem: because we don’t seem to have any consistently reliable sources, finding the true Socrates or the original Socrates proves to be an impossible task.  What we are left with, instead, is a composite picture assembled from various literary and philosophical components that give us what we might think of as Socratic themes or motifs.

ii. Aristophanes

Born in 450 B.C.E., Aristophanes wrote a number of comic plays intended to satirize and caricature many of his fellow Athenians.  His Clouds (423 B.C.E.) was so instrumental in parodying Socrates and painting him as a dangerous intellectual capable of corrupting the entire city that Socrates felt compelled in his trial defense to allude to the bad reputation he acquired as a result of the play (Plato, Apology 18a-b, 19c).  Aristophanes was much closer in age to Socrates than Plato and Xenophon, and as such is the only one of our sources exposed to Socrates in his younger years.

In the play, Socrates is the head of a phrontistêrion, a school of learning where students are taught the nature of the heavens and how to win court cases.  Socrates appears in a swing high above the stage, purportedly to better study the heavens.  His patron deities, the clouds, represent his interest in meteorology and may also symbolize the lofty nature of reasoning that may take either side of an argument.  The main plot of the play centers on an indebted man called Strepsiades, whose son Phidippides ends up in the school to learn how to help his father avoid paying off his debts.  By the end of the play, Phidippides has beaten his father, arguing that it is perfectly reasonable to do so on the grounds that, just as it is acceptable for a father to spank his son for his own good, so it is acceptable for a son to hit a father for his own good.  In addition to the theme that Socrates corrupts the youth, we therefore also find in the Clouds the origin of the rumor that Socrates makes the stronger argument the weaker and the weaker argument the stronger.  Indeed, the play features a personification of the Stronger Argument—which represents traditional education and values—attacked by the Weaker Argument—which advocates a life of pleasure.

While the Clouds is Aristophanes’ most famous and comprehensive attack on Socrates, Socrates appears in other of his comedies as well.  In the Birds (414 B.C.E.), Aristophanes coins a Greek verb based on Socrates’ name to insinuate that Socrates was truly a Spartan sympathizer (1280-83).  Young men who were found “Socratizing” were expressing their admiration of Sparta and its customs.  And in the Frogs (405), the Chorus claims that it is not refined to keep company with Socrates, who ignores the poets and wastes time with ‘frivolous words’ and ‘pompous word-scraping’ (1491-1499).

Aristophanes’ Socrates is a kind of variegated caricature of trends and new ideas emerging in Athens that he believed were threatening to the city.  We find a number of such themes prevalent in Presocratic philosophy and the teachings of the Sophists, including those about natural science, mathematics, social science, ethics, political philosophy, and the art of words.  Amongst other things, Aristophanes was troubled by the displacement of the divine through scientific explanations of the world and the undermining of traditional morality and custom by explanations of cultural life that appealed to nature instead of the gods.  Additionally, he was reticent about teaching skill in disputation, for fear that a clever speaker could just as easily argue for the truth as argue against it.  These issues constitute what is sometimes called the “new learning” developing in 5th century B.C.E. Athens, for which the Aristophanic Socrates is the iconic symbol.

iii. Xenophon

Born in the same decade as Plato (425 B.C.E.), Xenophon lived in the political deme of Erchia.  Though he knew Socrates he would not have had as much contact with him as Plato did.  He was not present in the courtroom on the day of Socrates’ trial, but rather heard an account of it later on from Hermogenes, a member of Socrates’ circle.  His depiction of Socrates is found principally in four works: Apology—in which Socrates gives a defense of his life before his jurors—Memorabilia—in which Xenophon himself explicates the charges against Socrates and tries to defend him—Symposium—a conversation between Socrates and his friends at a drinking party—and Oeconomicus—a Socratic discourse on estate management.  Socrates also appears in Xenophon’s Hellenica and Anabasis.

Xenophon’s reputation as a source on the life and ideas of Socrates is one on which scholars do not always agree.  Largely thought to be a significant source of information about Socrates before the 19th century, for most of the 20th century Xenophon’s ability to depict Socrates as a philosopher was largely called into question.  Following Schleiermacher, many argued that Xenophon himself was either a bad philosopher who did not understand Socrates, or not a philosopher at all, more concerned with practical, everyday matters like economics.  However, recent scholarship has sought to challenge this interpretation, arguing that it assumes an understanding of philosophy as an exclusively speculative and critical endeavor that does not attend to the ancient conception of philosophy as a comprehensive way of life.

While Plato will likely always remain the principal source on Socrates and Socratic themes, Xenophon’s Socrates is distinct in philosophically interesting ways.  He emphasizes the values of self-mastery (enkrateia), endurance of physical pain (karteria), and self-sufficiency (autarkeia).  For Xenophon’s Socrates, self-mastery or moderation is the foundation of virtue (Memorabilia, 1.5.4).  Whereas in Plato’s Apology the oracle tells Chaerephon that no one is wiser than Socrates, in Xenophon’s Apology Socrates claims that the oracle told Chaerephon that “no man was more free than I, more just, and more moderate” (Xenophon, Apology, 14).

Part of Socrates’ freedom consists in his freedom from want, precisely because he has mastered himself.  As opposed to Plato’s Socrates, Xenophon’s Socrates is not poor, not because he has much, but because he needs little.  Oeconomicus 11.3 for instance shows Socrates displeased with those who think him poor.  One can be rich even with very little on the condition that one has limited his needs, for wealth is just the excess of what one has over what one requires.  Socrates is rich because what he has is sufficient for what he needs (Memorabilia 1.2.1, 1.3.5, 4.2.38-9).

We also find Xenophon attributing to Socrates a proof of the existence of God.  The argument holds that human beings are the product of an intelligent design, and we therefore should conclude that there is a God who is the maker (dēmiourgos) or designer of all things (Memorabilia 1.4.2-7).  God creates a systematically ordered universe and governs it in the way our minds govern our bodies (Memorabilia 1.4.1-19, 4.3.1-18).  While Plato’s Timaeus tells the story of a dēmiourgos creating the world, it is Timaeus, not Socrates, who tells the story.  Indeed, Socrates speaks only sparingly at the beginning of the dialogue, and most scholars do not count as Socratic the cosmological arguments therein.

iv. Plato

Plato was Socrates’ most famous disciple, and the majority of what most people know about Socrates is known about Plato’s Socrates.  Plato was born to one of the wealthiest and politically influential families in Athens in 427 B.C.E., the son of Ariston and Perictione. His brothers were Glaucon and Adeimantus, who are Socrates’ principal interlocutors for the majority of the Republic.  Though Socrates is not present in every Platonic dialogue, he is in the majority of them, often acting as the main interlocutor who drives the conversation.

The attempt to extract Socratic views from Plato’s texts is itself a notoriously difficult problem, bound up with questions about the order in which Plato composed his dialogues, one’s methodological approach to reading them, and whether or not Socrates, or anyone else for that matter, speaks for Plato.  Readers interested in the details of this debate should consult “Plato.”  Generally speaking, the predominant view of Plato’s Socrates in the English-speaking world from the middle to the end of the 20th century was simply that he was Plato’s mouthpiece.  In other words, anything Socrates says in the dialogues is what Plato thought at the time he wrote the dialogue.  This view, put forth by the famous Plato scholar Gregory Vlastos, has been challenged in recent years, with some scholars arguing that Plato has no mouthpiece in the dialogues (see Cooper xxi-xxiii).  While we can attribute to Plato certain doctrines that are consistent throughout his corpus, there is no reason to think that Socrates, or any other speaker, always and consistently espouses these doctrines.

The main interpretive obstacle for those seeking the views of Socrates from Plato is the question of the order of the dialogues.  Thrasyllus, the 1st century (C.E.) Platonist who was the first to arrange the dialogues according to a specific paradigm, organized the dialogues into nine tetralogies, or groups of four, on the basis of the order in which he believed they should be read.  Another approach, customary for most scholars by the late 20th century, groups the dialogues into three categories on the basis of the order in which Plato composed them.  Plato begins his career, so the narrative goes, representing his teacher Socrates in typically short conversations about ethics, virtue, and the best human life.  These are “early” dialogues.  Only subsequently does Plato develop his own philosophical views—the most famous of which is the doctrine of the Forms or Ideas—that Socrates defends.  These “middle” dialogues put forth positive doctrines that are generally thought to be Platonic and not Socratic. Finally, towards the end of his life, Plato composes dialogues in which Socrates typically either hardly features at all or is altogether absent.  These are the “late” dialogues.

There are a number of complications with this interpretive thesis, and many of them focus on the portrayal of Socrates.  Though the Gorgias is an early dialogue, Socrates concludes the dialogue with a myth that some scholars attribute to a Pythagorean influence on Plato that he would not have had during Socrates’ lifetime.  Though the Parmenides is a middle dialogue, the younger Socrates speaks only at the beginning before Parmenides alone speaks for the remainder of the dialogue.  While the Philebus is a late dialogue, Socrates is the main speaker.  Some scholars identify the Meno as an early dialogue because Socrates refutes Meno’s attempts to articulate the nature of virtue.  Others, focusing on Socrates’ use of the theory of recollection and the method of hypothesis, argue that it is a middle dialogue.  Finally, while Plato’s most famous work the Republic is a middle dialogue, some scholars make a distinction within the Republic itself.  The first book, they argue, is Socratic, because in it we find Socrates refuting Thrasymachus’ definition of justice while maintaining that he knows nothing about justice.  The rest of the dialogue they claim, with its emphasis on the division of the soul and the metaphysics of the Forms, is Platonic.

To discern a consistent Socrates in Plato is therefore a difficult task.  Instead of speaking about chronology of composition, contemporary scholars searching for views that are likely to have been associated with the historical Socrates generally focus on a group of dialogues that are united by topical similarity.  These “Socratic dialogues” feature Socrates as the principal speaker, challenging his interlocutor to elaborate on and critically examine his own views while typically not putting forth substantive claims of his own.  These dialogues—including those that some scholars think are not written by Plato and those that most scholars agree are not written by Plato but that Thrasyllus included in his collection—are as follows: Euthyphro, Apology, Crito, Alcibiades I, Alcibiades II, Hipparchus, Rival Lovers, Theages, Charmides, Laches, Lysis, Euthydemus, Protagoras, Gorgias, Meno, Greater Hippias, Lesser Hippias, Ion, Menexenus, Clitophon, Minos.  Some of the more famous positions Socrates defends in these dialogues are covered in the content section.

v. Aristotle

Aristotle was born in 384 B.C.E., fifteen 15 years after the death of Socrates.  At the age of eighteen, he went to study at Plato’s Academy, and remained there for twenty years.  Afterwards, he traveled throughout Asia and was invited by Phillip II of Macedon to tutor his son Alexander, known to history as Alexander the Great.  While Aristotle would never have had the chance to meet Socrates, we have in his writings an account of both Socrates’ method and the topics about which he had conversations.  Given the likelihood that Aristotle heard about Socrates from Plato and those at his Academy, it is not surprising that most of what he says about Socrates follows the depiction of him in the Platonic dialogues.

Aristotle related four concrete points about Socrates.  The first is that Socrates asked questions without supplying an answer of his own, because he claimed to know nothing (De Elenchis Sophisticus 1836b6-8).  The picture of Socrates here is consistent with that of Plato’s Apology.  Second, Aristotle claims that Socrates never asked questions about nature, but concerned himself only with ethical questions.  Aristotle thus attributes to the historical Socrates both the method and topics we find in Plato’s Socratic dialogues.

Third, Aristotle claims that Socrates is the first to have employed epagōgē, a word typically rendered in English as “induction.”  This translation, however, is misleading, lest we impute to Socrates a preference for inductive reasoning as opposed to deductive reasoning.  The term better indicates that Socrates was fond or arguing via the use of analogy.  For instance, just as a doctor does not practice medicine for himself but for the best interest of his patient, so the ruler in the city takes no account of his own personal profit, but is rather interested in caring for his citizens (Republic 342d-e).

The fourth and final claim Aristotle makes about Socrates itself has two parts.  First, Socrates was the first to ask the question, ti esti: what is it?  For example, if someone were to suggest to Socrates that our children should grow up to be courageous, he would ask, what is courage?  That is, what is the universal definition or nature that holds for all examples of courage?  Second, as distinguished from Plato, Socrates did not separate universals from their particular instantiations.  For Plato, the noetic object, the knowable thing, is the separate universal, not the particular.  Socrates simply asked the “what is it” question (on this and the previous two points, see Metaphysics I.6.987a29-b14; cf. b22-24, b27-33, and see XIII.4.1078b12-34).

2. Content: What does Socrates Think?

Given the nature of these sources, the task of recounting what Socrates thought is not an easy one.  Nonetheless, reading Plato’s Apology, it is possible to articulate a number of what scholars today typically associate with Socrates.  Plato the author has his Socrates claim that Plato was present in the courtroom for Socrates’ defense (Apology 34a), and while this cannot mean that Plato records the defense as a word for word transcription, it is the closest thing we have to an account of what Socrates actually said at a concrete point in his life.

a. Presocratic Philosophy and the Sophists

Socrates opens his defense speech by defending himself against his older accusers (Apology 18a), claiming they have poisoned the minds of his jurors since they were all young men.  Amongst these accusers was Aristophanes.  In addition to the claim that Socrates makes the worse argument into the stronger, there is a rumor that Socrates idles the day away talking about things in the sky and below the earth.  His reply is that he never discusses such topics (Apology 18a-c).  Socrates is distinguishing himself here not just from the sophists and their alleged ability to invert the strength of arguments, but from those we have now come to call the Presocratic philosophers.

The Presocratics were not just those who came before Socrates, for there are some Presocratic philosophers who were his contemporaries.  The term is sometimes used to suggest that, while Socrates cared about ethics, the Presocratic philosophers did not.  This is misleading, for we have evidence that a number of Presocratics explored ethical issues.  The term is best used to refer to the group of thinkers whom Socrates did not influence and whose fundamental uniting characteristic was that they sought to explain the world in terms of its own inherent principles.  The 6th cn. Milesian Thales, for instance, believed that the fundamental principle of all things was water.  Anaximander believed the principle was the indefinite (apeiron), and for Anaxamines it was air.  Later in Plato’s Apology (26d-e), Socrates rhetorically asks whether Meletus thinks he is prosecuting Anaxagoras, the 5th cn. thinker who argued that the universe was originally a mixture of elements that have since been set in motion by Nous, or Mind.  Socrates suggests that he does not engage in the same sort of cosmological inquiries that were the main focus of many Presocratics.

The other group against which Socrates compares himself is the Sophists, learned men who travelled from city to city offering to teach the youth for a fee.  While he claims he thinks it an admirable thing to teach as Gorgias, Prodicus, or Hippias claim they can (Apology 20a), he argues that he himself does not have knowledge of human excellence or virtue (Apology 20b-c).  Though Socrates inquires after the nature of virtue, he does not claim to know it, and certainly does not ask to be paid for his conversations.

b. Socratic Themes in Plato’s Apology

i. Socratic Ignorance

Plato’s Socrates moves next to explain the reason he has acquired the reputation he has and why so many citizens dislike him.  The oracle at Delphi told Socrates’ friend Chaerephon, “no one is wiser than Socrates” (Apology 21a).  Socrates explains that he was not aware of any wisdom he had, and so set out to find someone who had wisdom in order to demonstrate that the oracle was mistaken.  He first went to the politicians but found them lacking wisdom.  He next visited the poets and found that, though they spoke in beautiful verses, they did so through divine inspiration, not because they had wisdom of any kind.  Finally, Socrates found that the craftsmen had knowledge of their own craft, but that they subsequently believed themselves to know much more than they actually did.  Socrates concluded that he was better off than his fellow citizens because, while they thought they knew something and did not, he was aware of his own ignorance.  The god who speaks through the oracle, he says, is truly wise, whereas human wisdom is worth little or nothing (Apology 23a).

This awareness of one’s own absence of knowledge is what is known as Socratic ignorance, and it is arguably the thing for which Socrates is most famous.  Socratic ignorance is sometimes called simple ignorance, to be distinguished from the double ignorance of the citizens with whom Socrates spoke.  Simple ignorance is being aware of one’s own ignorance, whereas double ignorance is not being aware of one’s ignorance while thinking that one knows.  In showing many influential figures in Athens that they did not know what they thought they did, Socrates came to be despised in many circles.

It is worth nothing that Socrates does not claim here that he knows nothing.  He claims that he is aware of his ignorance and that whatever it is that he does know is worthless.  Socrates has a number of strong convictions about what makes for an ethical life, though he cannot articulate precisely why these convictions are true.  He believes for instance that it is never just to harm anyone, whether friend or enemy, but he does not, at least in Book I of the Republic, offer a systematic account of the nature of justice that could demonstrate why this is true.  Because of his insistence on repeated inquiry, Socrates has refined his convictions such that he can both hold particular views about justice while maintaining that he does not know the complete nature of justice.

We can see this contrast quite clearly in Socrates’ cross-examination of his accuser Meletus.  Because he is charged with corrupting the youth, Socrates inquires after who it is that helps the youth (Apology, 24d-25a).  In the same way that we take a horse to a horse trainer to improve it, Socrates wants to know the person to whom we take a young person to educate him and improve him.  Meletus’ silence condemns him: he has never bothered to reflect on such matters, and therefore is unaware of his ignorance about matters that are the foundation of his own accusation (Apology 25b-c).  Whether or not Socrates—or Plato for that matter—actually thinks it is possible to achieve expertise in virtue is a subject on which scholars disagree.

ii. Priority of the Care of the Soul

Throughout his defense speech (Apology 20a-b, 24c-25c, 31b, 32d, 36c, 39d) Socrates repeatedly stresses that a human being must care for his soul more than anything else (see also Crito 46c-47d, Euthyphro 13b-c, Gorgias 520a4ff).  Socrates found that his fellow citizens cared more for wealth, reputation, and their bodies while neglecting their souls (Apology 29d-30b).  He believed that his mission from the god was to examine his fellow citizens and persuade them that the most important good for a human being was the health of the soul. Wealth, he insisted, does not bring about human excellence or virtue, but virtue makes wealth and everything else good for human beings (Apology 30b).

Socrates believes that his mission of caring for souls extends to the entirety of the city of Athens.  He argues that the god gave him to the city as a gift and that his mission is to help improve the city.  He thus attempts to show that he is not guilty of impiety precisely because everything he does is in response to the oracle and at the service of the god.  Socrates characterizes himself as a gadfly and the city as a sluggish horse in need of stirring up (Apology 30e).  Without philosophical inquiry, the democracy becomes stagnant and complacent, in danger of harming itself and others.  Just as the gadfly is an irritant to the horse but rouses it to action, so Socrates supposes that his purpose is to agitate those around him so that they begin to examine themselves.  One might compare this claim with Socrates’ assertion in the Gorgias that, while his contemporaries aim at gratification, he practices the true political craft because he aims at what is best (521d-e).  Such comments, in addition to the historical evidence that we have, are Socrates’ strongest defense that he is not only not a burden to the democracy but a great asset to it.

iii. The Unexamined Life

After the jury has convicted Socrates and sentenced him to death, he makes one of the most famous proclamations in the history of philosophy.  He tells the jury that he could never keep silent, because “the unexamined life is not worth living for human beings” (Apology 38a).  We find here Socrates’ insistence that we are all called to reflect upon what we believe, account for what we know and do not known, and generally speaking to seek out, live in accordance with, and defend those views that make for a well lived and meaningful life.

Some scholars call attention to Socrates’ emphasis on human nature here, and argue that the call to live examined lives follows from our nature as human beings.  We are naturally directed by pleasure and pain.  We are drawn to power, wealth and reputation, the sorts of values to which Athenians were drawn as well.  Socrates’ call to live examined lives is not necessarily an insistence to reject all such motivations and inclinations but rather an injunction to appraise their true worth for the human soul.  The purpose of the examined life is to reflect upon our everyday motivations and values and to subsequently inquire into what real worth, if any, they have.  If they have no value or indeed are even harmful, it is upon us to pursue those things that are truly valuable.

One can see in reading the Apology that Socrates examines the lives of his jurors during his own trial.  By asserting the primacy of the examined life after he has been convicted and sentenced to death, Socrates, the prosecuted, becomes the prosecutor, surreptitiously accusing those who convicted him of not living a life that respects their own humanity.  He tells them that by killing him they will not escape examining their lives.  To escape giving an account of one’s life is neither possible nor good, Socrates claims, but it is best to prepare oneself to be as good as possible (Apology 39d-e).

We find here a conception of a well-lived life that differs from one that would likely be supported by many contemporary philosophers.  Today, most philosophers would argue that we must live ethical lives (though what this means is of course a matter of debate) but that it is not necessary for everyone to engage in the sort of discussions Socrates had everyday, nor must one do so in order to be considered a good person.  A good person, we might say, lives a good life insofar as he does what is just, but he does not necessarily need to be consistently engaged in debates about the nature of justice or the purpose of the state.  No doubt Socrates would disagree, not just because the law might be unjust or the state might do too much or too little, but because, insofar as we are human beings, self-examination is always beneficial to us.

c. Other Socratic Positions and Arguments

In addition to the themes one finds in the Apology, the following are a number of other positions in the Platonic corpus that are typically considered Socratic.

i. Unity of Virtue; All Virtue is Knowledge

In the Protagoras (329b-333b) Socrates argues for the view that all of the virtues—justice, wisdom, courage, piety, and so forth—are one.  He provides a number of arguments for this thesis.  For example, while it is typical to think that one can be wise without being temperate, Socrates rejects this possibility on the grounds that wisdom and temperance both have the same opposite: folly.  Were they truly distinct, they would each have their own opposites.  As it stands, the identity of their opposites indicates that one cannot possess wisdom without temperance and vice versa.

This thesis is sometimes paired with another Socratic, view, that is, that virtue is a form of knowledge (Meno 87e-89a; cf. Euthydemus 278d-282a).  Things like beauty, strength, and health benefit human beings, but can also harm them if they are not accompanied by knowledge or wisdom.  If virtue is to be beneficial it must be knowledge, since all the qualities of the soul are in themselves neither beneficial not harmful, but are only beneficial when accompanied by wisdom and harmful when accompanied by folly.

ii. No One Errs Knowingly/No One Errs Willingly

Socrates famously declares that no one errs or makes mistakes knowingly (Protagoras 352c, 358b-b).  Here we find an example of Socrates’ intellectualism.  When a person does what is wrong, their failure to do what is right is an intellectual error, or due to their own ignorance about what is right.  If the person knew what was right, he would have done it.  Hence, it is not possible for someone simultaneously know what is right and do what is wrong.  If someone does what is wrong, they do so because they do not know what is right, and if they claim the have known what was right at the time when they committed the wrong, they are mistaken, for had they truly known what was right, they would have done it.

Socrates therefore denies the possibility of akrasia, or weakness of the will.  No one errs willingly (Protagoras 345c4-e6).  While it might seem that Socrates is equivocating between knowingly and willingly, a look at Gorgias 466a-468e helps clarify his thesis.  Tyrants and orators, Socrates tells Polus, have the least power of any member of the city because they do not do what they want.  What they do is not good or beneficial even though human beings only want what is good or beneficial.  The tyrant’s will, corrupted by ignorance, is in such a state that what follows from it will necessarily harm him.  Conversely, the will that is purified by knowledge is in such a state that what follows from it will necessarily be beneficial.

iii. All Desire is for the Good

One of the premises of the argument just mentioned is that human beings only desire the good.  When a person does something for the sake of something else, it is always the thing for the sake of which he is acting that he wants.  All bad things or intermediate things are done not for themselves but for the sake of something else that is good.  When a tyrant puts someone to death, for instance, he does this because he thinks it is beneficial in some way.  Hence his action is directed towards the good because this is what he truly wants (Gorgias 467c-468b).

A similar version of this argument is in the Meno, 77b-78b.  Those that desire bad things do not know that they are truly bad; otherwise, they would not desire them.  They do not naturally desire what is bad but rather desire those things that they believe to be good but that are in fact bad.  They desire good things even though they lack knowledge of what is actually good.

iv. It is Better to Suffer an Injustice Than to Commit One

Socrates infuriates Polus with the argument that it is better to suffer an injustice than commit one (Gorgias 475a-d).  Polus agrees that it is more shameful to commit an injustice, but maintains it is not worse.  The worst thing, in his view, is to suffer injustice.  Socrates argues that, if something is more shameful, it surpasses in either badness or pain or both.  Since committing an injustice is not more painful than suffering one, committing an injustice cannot surpass in pain or both pain and badness.  Committing an injustice surpasses suffering an injustice in badness; differently stated, committing an injustice is worse than suffering one.  Therefore, given the choice between the two, we should choose to suffer rather than commit an injustice.

This argument must be understood in terms of the Socratic emphasis on the care of the soul.  Committing an injustice corrupts one’s soul, and therefore committing injustice is the worst thing a person can do to himself (cf. Crito 47d-48a, Republic I 353d-354a).  If one commits injustice, Socrates goes so far as to claim that it is better to seek punishment than avoid it on the grounds that the punishment will purge or purify the soul of its corruption (Gorgias 476d-478e).

v. Eudaimonism

The Greek word for happiness is eudaimonia, which signifies not merely feeling a certain way but being a certain way.  A different way of translating eudaimonia is well-being.  Many scholars believe that Socrates holds two related but not equivalent principles regarding eudaimonia: first, that it is rationally required that a person make his own happiness the foundational consideration for his actions, and second, that each person does in fact pursue happiness as the foundational consideration for his actions.  In relation to Socrates’ emphasis on virtue, it is not entirely clear what that means.  Virtue could be identical to happiness—in which case there is no difference between the two and if I am virtuous I am by definition happy—virtue could be a part of happiness—in which case if I am virtuous I will be happy although I could be made happier by the addition of other goods—or virtue could be instrumental for happiness—in which case if I am virtuous I might be happy (and I couldn’t be happy without virtue), but there is no guarantee that I will be happy.

There are a number of passages in the Apology that seem to indicate that the greatest good for a human being is having philosophical conversation (36b-d, 37e-38a, 40e-41c). Meno 87c-89a suggests that knowledge of the good guides the soul toward happiness (cf. Euthydemus 278e-282a).  And at Gorgias 507a-c Socrates suggests that the virtuous person, acting in accordance with wisdom, attains happiness (cf. Gorgias 478c-e: the happiest person has no badness in his soul).

vi. Ruling is An Expertise

Socrates is committed to the theme that ruling is a kind of craft or art (technē).  As such, it requires knowledge.  Just as a doctor brings about a desired result for his patient—health, for instance—so the ruler should bring about some desired result in his subject (Republic 341c-d, 342c).  Medicine, insofar as it has the best interest of its patient in mind, never seeks to benefit the practitioner.  Similarly, the ruler’s job is to act not for his own benefit but for the benefit of the citizens of the political community.  This is not to say that there might not be some contingent benefit that accrues to the practitioner; the doctor, for instance, might earn a fine salary.  But this benefit is not intrinsic to the expertise of medicine as such.  One could easily conceive of a doctor that makes very little money.  One cannot, however, conceive of a doctor that does not act on behalf of his patient.  Analogously, ruling is always for the sake of the ruled citizen, and justice, contra the famous claim from Thrasymachus, is not whatever is in the interest of the ruling power (Republic 338c-339a).

d. Socrates the Ironist

The suspicion that Socrates is an ironist can mean a number of things: on the one hand, it can indicate that Socrates is saying something with the intent to convey the opposite meaning.  Some readers for instance, including a number in the ancient world, understood Socrates’ avowal of ignorance in precisely this way.  Many have interpreted Socrates’ praise of Euthyphro, in which he claims that he can learn from him and will become his pupil, as an example of this sort of irony (Euthyphro 5a-b).  On the other hand, the Greek word eirōneia was understood to carry with it a sense of subterfuge, rendering the sense of the word something like masking with the intent to deceive.

Additionally, there are a number of related questions about Socrates’ irony.   Is the interlocutor supposed to be aware of the irony, or is he ignorant of it?  Is it the job of the reader to discern the irony?  Is the purpose of irony rhetorical, intended to maintain Socrates’ position as the director of the conversation, or pedagogical, meant to encourage the interlocutor to learn something?  Could it be both?

Scholars disagree on the sense in which we ought to call Socrates ironic.  When Socrates asks Callicles to tell him what he means by the stronger and to go easy on him so that he might learn better, Callicles claims he is being ironic (Gorgias 489e).  Thrasymachus accuses Socrates of being ironic insofar as he pretends he does not have an account of justice, when he is actually hiding what he truly thinks (Republic 337a).  And though the Symposium is generally not thought to be a “Socratic” dialogue, we there find Alcibiades accusing Socrates of being ironic insofar as he acts like he is interested in him but then deny his advances (Symposium 216e, 218d).  It is not clear which kind of irony is at work with these examples.

Aristotle defines irony as an attempt at self-deprecation (Nicomachean Ethics 4.7, 1127b23-26).  He argues that self-deprecation is the opposite of boastfulness, and people that engage in this sort of irony do so to avoid pompousness and make their characters more attractive.  Above all, such people disclaim things that bring reputation.  On this reading, Socrates was prone to understatement.

There are some thinkers for whom Socratic irony is not just restricted to what Socrates says.  The 19th century Danish philosopher Søren Kierkegaard held the view that Socrates himself, his character, is ironic.  The 20th century philosopher Leo Strauss defined irony as the noble dissimulation of one’s worth.  On this reading, Socrates’ irony consisted in his refusal to display his superiority in front of his inferiors so that his message would be understood only by the privileged few.  As such, Socratic irony is intended to conceal Socrates’ true message.

3. Method: How Did Socrates Do Philosophy?

As famous as the Socratic themes are, the Socratic method is equally famous.  Socrates conducted his philosophical activity by means of question an answer, and we typically associate with him a method called the elenchus.  At the same time, Plato’s Socrates calls himself a midwife—who has no ideas of his own but helps give birth to the ideas of others—and proceeds dialectically—defined either as asking questions, embracing the practice of collection and division, or proceeding from hypotheses to first principles.

a. The Elenchus: Socrates the Refuter

A typical Socratic elenchus is a cross-examination of a particular position, proposition, or definition, in which Socrates tests what his interlocutor says and refutes it.  There is, however, great debate amongst scholars regarding not only what is being refuted but also whether or not the elenchus can prove anything.  There are questions, in other words, about the topic of the elenchus and its purpose or goal.

i. Topic

Socrates typically begins his elenchus with the question, “what is it”?  What is piety, he asks Euthyphro.  Euthyphro appears to give five separate definitions of piety: piety is proceeding against whomever does injustice (5d-6e), piety is what is loved by the gods (6e-7a), piety is what is loved by all the gods (9e), the godly and the pious is the part of the just that is concerned with the care of the gods (12e), and piety is the knowledge of sacrificing and praying (13d-14a).  For some commentators, what Socrates is searching for here is a definition.  Other commentators argue that Socrates is searching for more than just the definition of piety but seeks a comprehensive account of the nature of piety.  Whatever the case, Socrates refutes the answer given to him in response to the ‘what is it’ question.

Another reading of the Socratic elenchus is that Socrates is not just concerned with the reply of the interlocutor but is concerned with the interlocutor himself.  According to this view, Socrates is as much concerned with the truth or falsity of propositions as he is with the refinement of the interlocutor’s way of life.  Socrates is concerned with both epistemological and moral advances for the interlocutor and himself.  It is not propositions or replies alone that are refuted, for Socrates does not conceive of them dwelling in isolation from those that hold them.  Thus conceived, the elenchus refutes the person holding a particular view, not just the view.  For instance, Socrates shames Thrasymachus when he shows him that he cannot maintain his view that justice is ignorance and injustice is wisdom (Republic I 350d).  The elenchus demonstrates that Thrasymachus cannot consistently maintain all his claims about the nature of justice.  This view is consistent with a view we find in Plato’s late dialogue called the Sophist, in which the Visitor from Elea, not Socrates, claims that the soul will not get any advantage from learning that it is offered to it until someone shames it by refuting it (230b-d).

ii. Purpose

In terms of goal, there are two common interpretations of the elenchus.  Both have been developed by scholars in response to what Gregory Vlastos called the problem of the Socratic elenchus.  The problem is how Socrates can claim that position W is false, when the only thing he has established is its inconsistency with other premises whose truth he has not tried to establish in the elenchus.

The first response is what is called the constructivist position.  A constructivist argues that the elenchus establishes the truth or falsity of individual answers.  The elenchus on this interpretation can and does have positive results.  Vlastos himself argued that Socrates not only established the inconsistency of the interlocutor’s beliefs by showing their inconsistency, but that Socrates’ own moral beliefs were always consistent, able to withstand the test of the elenchus.  Socrates could therefore pick out a faulty premise in his elenctic exchange with an interlocutor, and sought to replace the interlocutor’s false beliefs with his own.

The second response is called the non-constructivist position.  This position claims that Socrates does not think the elenchus can establish the truth or falsity of individual answers.  The non-constructivist argues that all the elenchus can show is the inconsistency of W with the premises X, Y, and Z.  It cannot establish that ~W is the case, or for that matter replace any of the premises with another, for this would require a separate argument.  The elenchus establishes the falsity of the conjunction of W, X, Y, and Z, but not the truth or falsity of any of those premises individually.  The purpose of the elenchus on this interpretation is to show the interlocutor that he is confused, and, according to some scholars, to use that confusion as a stepping stone on the way to establishing a more consistent, well-formed set of beliefs.

b. Maieutic: Socrates the Midwife

In Plato’s Theaetetus Socrates identifies himself as a midwife (150b-151b).  While the dialogue is not generally considered Socratic, it is elenctic insofar as it tests and refutes Theaetetus’ definitions of knowledge.  It also ends without a conclusive answer to its question, a characteristic it shares with a number of Socratic dialogues.

Socrates tells Theaetetus that his mother Phaenarete was a midwife (149a) and that he himself is an intellectual midwife.  Whereas the craft of midwifery (150b-151d) brings on labor pains or relieves them in order to help a woman deliver a child, Socrates does not watch over the body but over the soul, and helps his interlocutor give birth to an idea.  He then applies the elenchus to test whether or not the intellectual offspring is a phantom or a fertile truth.  Socrates stresses that both he and actual midwives are barren, and cannot give birth to their own offspring.  In spite of his own emptiness of ideas, Socrates claims to be skilled at bringing forth the ideas of others and examining them.

c. Dialectic: Socrates the Constructer

The method of dialectic is thought to be more Platonic than Socratic, though one can understand why many have associated it with Socrates himself.  For one thing, the Greek dialegesthai ordinarily means simply “to converse” or “to discuss.”  Hence when Socrates is distinguishing this sort of discussion from rhetorical exposition in the Gorgias, the contrast seems to indicate his preference for short questions and answers as opposed to longer speeches (447b-c, 448d-449c).

There are two other definitions of dialectic in the Platonic corpus.  First, in the Republic, Socrates distinguishes between dianoetic thinking, which makes use of the senses and assumes hypotheses, and dialectical thinking, which does not use the senses and goes beyond hypotheses to first principles (Republic VII 510c-511c, 531d-535a).  Second, in the Phaedrus, Sophist, Statesman, and Philebus, dialectic is defined as a method of collection and division.  One collects things that are scattered into one kind and also divides each kind according to its species (Phaedrus 265d-266c).

Some scholars view the elenchus and dialectic as fundamentally different methods with different goals, while others view them as consistent and reconcilable.  Some even view them as two parts of one argument procedure, in which the elenchus refutes and dialectic constructs.

4. Legacy: How Have Other Philosophers Understood Socrates?

Nearly every school of philosophy in antiquity had something positive to say about Socrates, and most of them drew their inspiration from him.  Socrates also appears in the works of many famous modern philosophers.  Immanuel Kant, the 18th century German philosopher best known for the categorical imperative, hailed Socrates, amongst other ancient philosophers, as someone who didn’t just speculate but who lived philosophically.  One of the more famous quotes about Socrates is from John Stuart Mill, the 19th century utilitarian philosopher who claimed that it is better to be a human being dissatisfied than a pig satisfied; better to be Socrates dissatisfied than a fool satisfied.  The following is but a brief survey of Socrates as he is treated in philosophical thinking that emerges after the death of Aristotle in 322 B.C.E.

a. Hellenistic Philosophy

i. The Cynics

The Cynics greatly admired Socrates, and traced their philosophical lineage back to him.  One of the first representatives of the Socratic legacy was the Cynic Diogenes of Sinope.  No genuine writings of Diogenes have survived and most of our evidence about him is anecdotal.  Nevertheless, scholars attribute a number of doctrines to him.  He sought to undermine convention as a foundation for ethical values and replace it with nature.  He understood the essence of human being to be rational, and defined happiness as freedom and self-mastery, an objective readily accessible to those who trained the body and mind.

ii. The Stoics

There is a biographical story according to which Zeno, the founder of the Stoic school and not the Zeno of Zeno's Paradoxes, became interested in philosophy by reading and inquiring about Socrates.  The Stoics took themselves to be authentically Socratic, especially in defending the unqualified restriction of ethical goodness to ethical excellence, the conception of ethical excellence as a kind of knowledge, a life not requiring any bodily or external advantage nor ruined by any bodily disadvantage, and the necessity and sufficiency of ethical excellence for complete happiness.

Zeno is known for his characterization of the human good as a smooth flow of life.  Stoics were therefore attracted to the Socratic elenchus because it could expose inconsistencies—both social and psychological—that disrupted one’s life.  In the absence of justification for a specific action or belief, one would not be in harmony with oneself, and therefore would not live well.  On the other hand, if one held a position that survived cross-examination, such a position would be consistent and coherent.  The Socratic elenchus was thus not just an important social and psychological test, but also an epistemological one.  The Stoics held that knowledge was a coherent set of psychological attitudes, and therefore a person holding attitudes that could withstand the elenchus could be said to have knowledge.  Those with inconsistent or incoherent psychological commitments were thought to be ignorant.

Socrates also figures in Roman Stoicism, particularly in the works of Seneca and Epictetus.  Both men admired Socrates’ strength of character.  Seneca praises Socrates for his ability to remain consistent unto himself in the face of the threat posed by the Thirty Tyrants, and also highlights the Socratic focus on caring for oneself instead of fleeing oneself and seeking fulfillment by external means.  Epictetus, when offering advice about holding to one’s own moral laws as inviolable maxims, claims, “though you are not yet a Socrates, you ought, however, to live as one desirous of becoming a Socrates” (Enchiridion 50).

One aspect of Socrates to which Epictetus was particularly attracted was the elenchus.  Though his understanding of the process is in some ways different from Socrates’, throughout his Discourses Epictetus repeatedly stresses the importance of recognition of one’s ignorance (2.17.1) and awareness of one’s own impotence regarding essentials (2.11.1).  He characterizes Socrates as divinely appointed to hold the elenctic position (3.21.19) and associates this role with Socrates’ protreptic expertise (2.26.4-7).  Epictetus encouraged his followers to practice the elenchus on themselves, and claims that Socrates did precisely this on account of his concern with self-examination (2.1.32-3).

iii. The Skeptics

Broadly speaking, skepticism is the view that we ought to be either suspicious of claims to epistemological truth or at least withhold judgment from affirming absolute claims to knowledge.  Amongst Pyrrhonian skeptics, Socrates appears at times like a dogmatist and at other times like a skeptic or inquirer.  On the one hand, Sextus Empiricus lists Socrates as a thinker who accepts the existence of god (Against the Physicists, I.9.64) and then recounts the cosmological argument that Xenophon attributes to Socrates (Against the Physicists, I.9.92-4).  On the other hand, in arguing that human being is impossible to conceive, Sextus Empiricus cites Socrates as unsure whether or not he is a human being or something else (Outlines of Pyrrhonism 2.22).  Socrates is also said to have remained in doubt about this question (Against the Professors 7.264).

Academic skeptics grounded their position that nothing can be known in Socrates’ admission of ignorance in the Apology (Cicero, On the Orator 3.67, Academics 1.44).  Arcesilaus, the first head of the Academy to take it toward a skeptical turn, picked up from Socrates the procedure of arguing, first asking others to give their positions and then refuting them (Cicero, On Ends 2.2, On the Orator 3.67, On the Nature of the Gods 1.11).  While the Academy would eventually move away from skepticism, Cicero, speaking on behalf of the Academy of Philo, makes the claim that Socrates should be understood as endorsing the claim that nothing, other than one’s own ignorance, could be known (Academics 2.74).

iv. The Epicurean

The Epicureans were one of the few schools that criticized Socrates, though many scholars think that this was in part because of their animus toward their Stoic counterparts, who admired him.  In general, Socrates is depicted in Epicurean writings as a sophist, rhetorician, and skeptic who ignored natural science for the sake of ethical inquiries that concluded without answers.  Colotes criticizes Socrates’ statement in the Phaedrus (230a) that he does not know himself (Plutarch, Against Colotes 21 1119b), and Philodemus attacks Socrates’ argument in the Protagoras (319d) that virtue cannot be taught (Rhetoric I 261, 8ff).

The Epicureans wrote a number of books against several of Plato’s Socratic dialogues, including the Lysis, Euthydemus, and Gorgias.  In the Gorgias we find Socrates suspicious of the view that pleasure is intrinsically worthy and his insistence that pleasure is not the equivalent of the good (Gorgias 495b-499b).  In defining pleasure as freedom from disturbance (ataraxia) and defining this sort of pleasure as the sole good for human beings, the Epicureans shared little with the unbridled hedonism Socrates criticizes Callicles for embracing.  Indeed, in the Letter to Menoeceus, Epicurus explicitly argues against pursuing this sort of pleasure (131-132).  Nonetheless, the Epicureans did equate pleasure with the good, and the view that pleasure is not the equivalent of the good could not have endeared Socrates to their sentiment.

Another reason for the Epicurean refusal to praise Socrates or make him a cornerstone of their tradition was his perceived irony.  According to Cicero, Epicurus was opposed to Socrates’ representing himself as ignorant while simultaneously praising others like Protagoras, Hippias, Prodicus, and Gorgias (Rhetoric, Vol. II, Brutus 292).  This irony for the Epicureans was pedagogically pointless: if Socrates had something to say, he should have said it instead of hiding it.

v. The Peripatetics

Aristotle’s followers, the Peripatetics, either said little about Socrates or were pointedly vicious in their attacks.  Amongst other things, the Peripatetics accused Socrates of being a bigamist, a charge that appears to have gained so much traction that the Stoic Panaetius wrote a refutation of it (Plutarch, Aristides 335c-d).  The general peripatetic criticism of Socrates, similar in one way to the Epicureans, was that he concentrated solely on ethics, and that this was an unacceptable ideal for the philosophical life.

b. Modern Philosophy

i. Hegel

In Socrates, Hegel found what he called the great historic turning point (Philosophy of History, 448).  With Socrates, Hegel claims, two opposed rights came into collision: the individual consciousness and the universal law of the state.  Prior to Socrates, morality for the ancients was present but it was not present Socratically.  That is, the good was present as a universal, without its having had the form of the conviction of the individual in his consciousness (407).  Morality was present as an immediate absolute, directing the lives of citizens without their having reflected upon it and deliberated about it for themselves.  The law of the state, Hegel claims, had authority as the law of the gods, and thus had a universal validity that was recognized by all (408).

In Hegel’s view the coming of Socrates signals a shift in the relationship between the individual and morality.  The immediate now had to justify itself to the individual consciousness.  Hegel thus not only ascribes to Socrates the habit of asking questions about what one should do but also about the actions that the state has prescribed.  With Socrates, consciousness is turned back within itself and demands that the law should establish itself before consciousness, internal to it, not merely outside it (408-410).   Hegel attributes to Socrates a reflective questioning that is skeptical, which moves the individual away from unreflective obedience and into reflective inquiry about the ethical standards of one’s community.

Generally, Hegel finds in Socrates a skepticism that renders ordinary or immediate knowledge confused and insecure, in need of reflective certainty which only consciousness can bring (370).  Though he attributes to the sophists the same general skeptical comportment, in Socrates Hegel locates human subjectivity at a higher level.  With Socrates and onward we have the world raising itself to the level of conscious thought and becoming object for thought.  The question as to what Nature is gives way to the question about what Truth is, and the question about the relationship of self-conscious thought to real essence becomes the predominant philosophical issue (450-1).

ii. Kierkegaard

Kierkegaard’s most well recognized views on Socrates are from his dissertation, The Concept of Irony With Continual Reference to Socrates.  There, he argues that Socrates is not the ethical figure that the history of philosophy has thought him to be, but rather an ironist in all that he does.  Socrates does not just speak ironically but is ironic.  Indeed, while most people have found Aristophanes’ portrayal of Socrates an obvious exaggeration and caricature, Kierkegaard goes so far as to claim that he came very close to the truth in his depiction of Socrates.  He rejects Hegel’s picture of Socrates ushering in a new era of philosophical reflection and instead argues that the limits of Socratic irony testified to the need for religious faith.  As opposed to the Hegelian view that Socratic irony was an instrument in the service of the development of self-consciousness, Kierkegaard claims that irony was Socrates’ position or comportment, and that he did not have any more than this to give.

Later in his writing career Kierkegaard comes to think that he has neglected Socrates’ significance as an ethical and religious figure.  In his final essay entitled My Task, Kierkegaard claims that his mission is a Socratic one; that is, in his task to reinvigorate a Christianity that remained the cultural norm but had, in Kierkegaard’s eyes, nearly ceased altogether to be practiced authentically, Kierkegaard conceives of himself as a kind of Christian Socrates, rousing Christians from their complacency to a conception of Christian faith as the highest, most passionate expression of individual subjectivity.  Kierkegaard therefore sees himself as a sort of Christian gadfly.  The Socratic call to become aware of one’s own ignorance finds its parallel in the Kierkegaardian call to recognize one’s own failing to truly live as a Christian.  The Socratic claim to ignorance—while Socrates is closer to knowledge than his contemporaries—is replaced by the Kierkegaard’s claim that he is not a Christian—though certainly more so than his own contemporaries.

iii. Nietzsche

Nietzsche’s most famous account of Socrates is his scathing portrayal in The Birth of Tragedy, in which Socrates and rational thinking lead to the emergence of an age of decadence in Athens.  The delicate balance in Greek culture between the Apollonian—order, calmness, self-control, restraint—and the Dionysian—chaos, revelry, self-forgetfulness, indulgence— initially represented on stage in the tragedies of Aeschylus and Sophocles, gave way to the rationalism of Euripides.  Euripides, Nietzsche argues, was only a mask for the newborn demon called Socrates (section 12).  Tragedy—and Greek culture more generally—was corrupted by “aesthetic Socratism”, whose supreme law, Nietzsche argues, was that ‘to be beautiful everything must be intelligible’.  Whereas the former sort of tragedy absorbed the spectator in the activities and sufferings of its chief characters, the emergence of Socrates heralded the onset of a new kind of tragedy in which this identification is obstructed by the spectators having to figure out the meaning and presuppositions of the characters’ suffering.

Nietzsche continues his attack on Socrates later in his career in Twilight of the Idols.  Socrates here represents the lowest class of people (section 3), and his irony consists in his being an exaggeration at the same time as he conceals himself (4).  He is the inventor of dialectic (5) which he wields mercilessly because, being an ugly plebeian, he had no other means of expressing himself (6) and therefore employed question and answer to render his opponent powerless (7).  Socrates turned dialectic into a new kind of contest (8), and because his instincts had turned against each other and were in anarchy (9), he established the rule of reason as a counter-tyrant in order not to perish (10).  Socrates’ decadence here consists in his having to fight his instincts (11).  He was thus profoundly anti-life, so much so that he wanted to die (12).

Nonetheless, while Nietzsche accuses Socrates of decadence, he nevertheless recognizes him as a powerful individual, which perhaps accounts for why we at times find in Nietzsche a hesitant admiration of Socrates.  He calls Socrates one of the very greatest instinctive forces (The Birth of Tragedy, section 13), labels him as a “free spirit” (Human, All Too Human I, 433) praises him as the first “philosopher of life” in his 17th lecture on the Preplatonics, and anoints him a ‘virtuoso of life’ in his notebooks from 1875.  Additionally, contra Twilight of the Idols, in Thus Spoke Zarathustra, Nietzsche speaks of a death in which one’s virtue still shines, and some commentators have seen in this a celebration of the way in which Socrates died.

iv. Heidegger

Heidegger finds in Socrates a kinship with his own view that the truth of philosophy lies in a certain way of seeing things, and thus is identical with a particular kind of method.  He attributes to Socrates the view that the truth of some subject matter shows itself not in some definition that is the object or end of a process of inquiry, but in the very process of inquiry itself.  Heidegger characterizes the Socratic method as a kind of productive negation: by refuting that which stands in front of it—in Socrates’ case, an interlocutor’s definition—it discloses the positive in the very process of questioning.  Socrates is not interested in articulating propositions about piety but rather concerned with persisting in a questioning relation to it that preserves its irreducible sameness.  Behind multiple examples of pious action is Piety, and yet Piety is not something that can be spoken of.  It is that which discloses itself through the process of silent interrogation.

It is precisely in his emphasis on silence that Heidegger diverges from Socrates.  Where Socrates insisted on the give and take of question and answer, Heideggerian questioning is not necessarily an inquiry into the views of others but rather an openness to the truth that one maintains without the need to speak.  To remain in dialogue with a given phenomenon is not the same thing as conversing about it, and true dialogue is always silent.

v. Gadamer

As Heidegger’s student, Gadamer shares his fundamental view that truth and method cannot be divorced in philosophy.  At the same time, his hermeneutics leads him to argue for the importance of dialectic as conversation.  Gadamer claims that whereas philosophical dialectic presents the whole truth by superceding all its partial propositions, hermeneutics too has the task of revealing a totality of meaning in all its relations.  The distinguishing characteristic of Gadamer’s hermeneutical dialectic is that it recognizes radical finitude: we are always already in an open-ended dialogical situation.  Conversation with the interlocutor is thus not a distraction that leads us away from seeing the truth but rather is the site of truth.  It is for this reason that Gadamer claims Plato communicated his philosophy only in dialogues: it was more than just an homage to Socrates, but was a reflection of his view that the word find its confirmation in another and in the agreement of another.

Gadamer also sees in the Socratic method an ethical way of being.  That is, he does not just think that Socrates converses about ethics but that repeated Socratic conversation is itself indicative of an ethical comportment.  On this account, Socrates knows the good not because he can give some final definition of it but rather because of his readiness to give an account of it.  The problem of not living an examined life is not that we might live without knowing what is ethical, but because without asking questions as Socrates does, we will not be ethical.

5. References and Further Reading

  • Ahbel-Rappe, Sara, and Rachana Kamtekar (eds.), A Companion to Socrates (Oxford: Blackwell, 2006).
  • Arrowsmith, William, Lattimore, Richmond, and Parker, Douglass (trans.), Four Plays by Aristophanes: The Clouds, The Birds, Lysistrata, The Frogs (New York: Meridian, 1994).
  • Barnes, Jonathan, Complete Works of Aristotle vols. 1 & 2  (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1984).
  • Benson, Hugh H. (ed.), Essays on the Philosophy of Socrates (New York: Oxford University Press, 1992).
  • Brickhouse, Thomas C. & Smith, Nicholas D., Plato’s Socrates (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1994).
  • Burkert, Walter, Greek Religion (Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1985).
  • Cooper, John M., Plato: Collected Works (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1997).
  • Guthrie, W.K.C., Socrates (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1971).
  • Kahn, Charles H., Plato and the Socratic Dialogue (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996).
  • Kraut, Richard (ed.), The Cambridge Companion to Plato (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1992).
  • Morrison, Donald R., The Cambridge Companion to Socrates (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2012).
  • Rudebusch, George, Socrates (Malden, MA: Wiley-Blackwell, 2009).
  • Santas, Gerasimos, Socrates: Philosophy in Plato’s Early Dialogues (London: Routledge & Kegan Paul, 1979).
  • Taylor, C.C.W, 1998, Socrates (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1998).
  • Vlastos, Gregory, Socrates, Ironist and Moral Philosopher (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1991).
  • Xenophon: Memorabilia. Oeconomicus. Symposium. Apologia. (Loeb Classical Library, Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1923).


Author Information

James M. Ambury
King’s College
U. S. A.

John Locke (1632—1704)

LockeJohn Locke was among the most famous philosophers and political theorists of the 17th century.  He is often regarded as the founder of a school of thought known as British Empiricism, and he made foundational contributions to modern theories of limited, liberal government. He was also influential in the areas of theology, religious toleration, and educational theory. In his most important work, the Essay Concerning Human Understanding, Locke set out to offer an analysis of the human mind and its acquisition of knowledge. He offered an empiricist theory according to which we acquire ideas through our experience of the world. The mind is then able to examine, compare, and combine these ideas in numerous different ways. Knowledge consists of a special kind of relationship between different ideas. Locke’s emphasis on the philosophical examination of the human mind as a preliminary to the philosophical investigation of the world and its contents represented a new approach to philosophy, one which quickly gained a number of converts, especially in Great Britain. In addition to this broader project, the Essay contains a series of more focused discussions on important, and widely divergent, philosophical themes. In politics, Locke is best known as a proponent of limited government. He uses a theory of natural rights to argue that governments have obligations to their citizens, have only limited powers over their citizens, and can ultimately be overthrown by citizens under certain circumstances. He also provided powerful arguments in favor of religious toleration. This article attempts to give a broad overview of all key areas of Locke’s thought.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Works
  2. The Main Project of the Essay
    1. Ideas
    2. The Critique of Nativism
    3. Idea Acquisition
    4. Language
    5. The Account of Knowledge
  3. Special Topics in the Essay
    1. Primary and Secondary Qualities
    2. Mechanism
    3. Volition and Agency
    4. Personhood and Personal Identity
    5. Real and Nominal Essences
    6. Religious Epistemology
  4. Political Philosophy
    1. The Two Treatises
    2. Property
    3. Toleration
  5. Theology
  6. Education
  7. Locke’s Influence
  8. References and Further Reading
    1. Locke’s Works
    2. Recommended Reading

1. Life and Works

John Locke was born in 1632 in Wrington, a small village in southwestern England. His father, also named John, was a legal clerk and served with the Parliamentary forces in the English Civil War. His family was well-to-do, but not of particularly high social or economic standing. Locke spent his childhood in the West Country and as a teenager was sent to Westminster School in London.

Locke was successful at Westminster and earned a place at Christ Church, Oxford. He was to remain in Oxford from 1652 until 1667. Although he had little appreciation for the traditional scholastic philosophy he learned there, Locke was successful as a student and after completing his undergraduate degree he held a series of administrative and academic posts in the college. Some of Locke’s duties included instruction of undergraduates. One of his earliest substantive works, the Essays on the Law of Nature, was developed in the course of his teaching duties. Much of Locke’s intellectual effort and energy during his time at Oxford, especially during his later years there, was devoted to the study of medicine and natural philosophy (what we would now call science). Locke read widely in these fields, participated in various experiments, and became acquainted with Robert Boyle and many other notable natural philosophers. He also undertook the normal course of education and training to become a physician.

Locke left Oxford for London in 1667 where he became attached to the family of Anthony Ashley Cooper (then Lord Ashley, later the Earl of Shaftesbury). Locke may have played a number of roles in the household, mostly likely serving as tutor to Ashley’s son. In London, Locke continued to pursue his interests in medicine and natural philosophy. He formed a close working relationship with Thomas Sydenham, who later became one the most famous physicians of the age. He made a number of contacts within the newly formed Royal Society and became a member in 1668. He also acted as the personal physician to Lord Ashley. Indeed, on one occasion Locke participated in a very delicate surgical operation which Ashley credited with saving his life. Ashley was one of the most prominent English politicians at the time. Through his patronage Locke was able to hold a series of governmental posts. Most of his work related to policies in England’s American and Caribbean colonies. Most importantly, this was the period in Locke’s life when he began the project which would culminate in his most famous work, the Essay Concerning Human Understanding. The two earliest drafts of that work date from 1671. He was to continue work on this project intermittentlyfor nearly twenty years.

Locke travelled in France for several years starting in 1675. When he returned to England it was only to be for a few years. The political scene had changed greatly while Locke was away. Shaftesbury (as Ashley was now known) was out of favor and Locke’s association with him had become a liability. It was around this time that Locke composed his most famous political work, the Two Treatises Concerning Government. Although the Two Treatises would not be published until 1689 they show that he had already solidified his views on the nature and proper form of government. Following Shaftesbury’s death Locke fled to the Netherlands to escape political persecution. While there Locke travelled a great deal (sometimes for his own safety) and worked on two projects. First, he continued work on the Essay. Second, he wrote a work entitled Epistola de Tolerantia, which was published anonymously in 1689. Locke’s experiences in England, France, and the Netherlands convinced him that governments should be much more tolerant of religious diversity than was common at the time.

Following the Glorious Revolution of 1688-1689 Locke was able to return to England. He published both the Essay and the Two Treatises (the second anonymously) shortly after his return. He initially stayed in London but soon moved to the home of Francis and Damaris Masham in the small village of Oates, Essex. Damaris Masham, who was the daughter of a notable philosopher named Ralph Cudworth, had become acquainted with Locke several years before. The two formed a very close friendship which lasted until Locke’s death. During this period Locke kept busy working on politics, toleration, philosophy, economics, and educational theory.

Locke engaged in a number of controversies during his life, including a notable one with Jonas Proast over toleration. But Locke’s most famous and philosophically important controversy was with Edward Stillingfleet, the Bishop of Worcester. Stillingfleet, in addition to being a powerful political and theological figure, was an astute and forceful critic. The two men debated a number of the positions in the Essay in a series of published letters.

In his later years Locke devoted much of his attention to theology. His major work in this field was The Reasonableness of Christianity, published (again anonymously) in 1695. This work was controversial because Locke argued that many beliefs traditionally believed to be mandatory for Christians were unnecessary. Locke argued for a highly ecumenical form of Christianity. Closer to the time of his death Locke wrote a work on the Pauline Epistles. The work was unfinished, but published posthumously. A short work on miracles also dates from this time and was published posthumously.

Locke suffered from health problems for most of his adult life. In particular, he had respiratory ailments which were exacerbated by his visits to London where the air quality was very poor. His health took a turn for the worse in 1704 and he became increasingly debilitated. He died on 28 October 1704 while Damaris Masham was reading him the Psalms. He was buried at High Laver, near Oates. He wrote his own epitaph which was both humble and forthright.

2. The Main Project of the Essay

According to Locke’s own account the motivation for writing the Essay came to him while debating an unrelated topic with friends. He reports that they were able to make little headway on this topic and that they very quickly met with a number of confusions and difficulties. Locke realized that to make progress on this topic it was first necessary to examine something more fundamental: the human understanding. It was “necessary to examine our own Abilities, and see, what Objects our Understandings were, or were not fitted to deal with.” (Epistle, 7).

Locke’s insight was that before we can analyze the world and our access to it we have to know something about ourselves. We need to know how we acquire knowledge. We also need to know which areas of inquiry we are well suited to and which are epistemically closed to us, that is, which areas are such that we could not know them even in principle. We further need to know what knowledge consists in.  In keeping with these questions, at the very outset of the Essay Locke writes that it is his “Purpose enquire into the Original, Certainty, and Extent of humane Knowledge; together, with the Grounds and Degrees of Belief, Opinion, and Assent.” (1.1.2, 42). Locke thinks that it is only once we understand our cognitive capabilities that we can suitably direct our researches into the world. This may have been what Locke had in mind when he claimed that part of his ambition in the Essay was to be an “Under-Laborer” who cleared the ground and laid the foundations for the work of famous scientists like Robert Boyle and Isaac Newton.

The Essay is divided into four books with each book contributing to Locke’s overall goal of examining the human mind with respect to its contents and operations. In Book I Locke rules out one possible origin of our knowledge. He argues that our knowledge cannot have been innate. This sets up Book II in which Locke argues that all of our ideas come from experience. In this book he seeks to give an account of how even ideas like God, infinity, and space could have been acquired through our perceptual access to the world and our mental operations. Book III is something of a digression as Locke turns his attention to language and the role it plays in our theorizing. Locke’s main goal here is cautionary, he thinks language is often an obstacle to understanding and he offers some recommendations to avoid confusion. Finally, Book IV discusses knowledge, belief, and opinion. Locke argues that knowledge consists of special kinds of relations between ideas and that we should regulate our beliefs accordingly.

a. Ideas

The first chapter of the Essay contains an apology for the frequent use of the word “idea” in the book. According to Locke, ideas are the fundamental units of mental content and so play an integral role in his explanation of the human mind and his account of our knowledge. Locke was not the first philosopher to give ideas a central role; Descartes, for example, had relied heavily on them in explaining the human mind. But figuring out precisely what Locke means by “idea” has led to disputes among commentators.

One place to begin is with Locke’s own definition. He claims that by “idea” he means “whatsoever is the Object of the Understanding when a Man thinks…whatever is meant by Phantasm, Notion, Species, or whatever it is, which the Mind can be employ’d about in thinking.” (1.1.8, 47). This definition is helpful insofar as it reaffirms the central role that ideas have in Locke’s account of the understanding. Ideas are the sole entities upon which our minds work. Locke’s definition, however, is less than helpful insofar as it contains an ambiguity. On one reading, ideas are mental objects. The thought is that when an agent perceives an external world object like an apple there is some thing in her mind which represents that apple. So when an agent considers an apple what she is really doing is thinking about the idea of that apple. On a different reading, ideas are mental actions. The thought here is that when an agent perceives an apple she is really perceiving the apple in a direct, unmediated way. The idea is the mental act of making perceptual contact with the external world object. In recent years, most commentators have adopted the first of these two readings. But this debate will be important in the discussion of knowledge below.

b. The Critique of Nativism

The first of the Essay’s four books is devoted to a critique of nativism, the doctrine that some ideas are innate in the human mind, rather than received in experience. It is unclear precisely who Locke’s targets in this book are, though Locke does cite Herbert of Cherbury and other likely candidates include René Descartes, the Cambridge Platonists, and a number of lesser known Anglican theologians. Finding specific targets, however, might not be that important given that much of what Locke seeks to do in Book I is motivate and make plausible the alternative account of idea acquisition that he offers in Book II.

The nativist view which Locke attacks in Book I holds that human beings have mental content which is innate in the mind. This means that there are certain ideas (units of mental content) which were neither acquired via experience nor constructed by the mind out of ideas received in experience. The most popular version of this position holds that there are certain ideas which God planted in all minds at the moment of their creation.

Locke attacks both the view that we have any innate principles (for example, the whole is greater than the part, do unto others as you would have done unto you, etc.) as well as the view that there are any innate singular ideas (for example, God, identity, substance,  and so forth). The main thrust of Locke’s argument lies in pointing out that none of the mental content alleged to be innate is universally shared by all humans. He notes that children and the mentally disabled, for example, do not have in their minds an allegedly innate complex thought like “equals taken from equals leave equals”. He also uses evidence from travel literature to point out that many non-Europeans deny what were taken to be innate moral maxims and that some groups even lack the idea of a God. Locke takes the fact that not all humans have these ideas as evidence that they were not implanted by God in humans minds, and that they are therefore acquired rather than innate.

There is one misunderstanding which it is important to avoid when considering Locke’s anti-nativism. The misunderstanding is, in part, suggested by Locke’s claim that the mind is like a tabula rasa (a blank slate) prior to sense experience. This makes it sound as though the mind is nothing prior to the advent of ideas. In fact, Locke’s position is much more nuanced. He makes it clear that the mind has any number of inherent capacities, predispositions, and inclinations prior to receiving any ideas from sensation. His anti-nativist point is just that none of these is triggered or exercised until the mind receives ideas from sensation. 

c. Idea Acquisition

In Book II Locke offers his alternative theory of how the human mind comes to be furnished with the ideas it has. Every day we think of complex things like orange juice, castles, justice, numbers, and motion. Locke’s claim is that the ultimate origin of all of these ideas lies in experience: “Experience: In that, all our Knowledge is founded; and from that it ultimately derives itself. Our Observation employ’d either about external, sensible Objects; or about the internal Operations of our Minds, perceived and reflected on by ourselves, is that, which supplies our Understandings with all the material of thinking. These two are the Fountains of Knowledge, from whence all the Ideas we have, or can naturally have, do spring.” (2.1.2, 104).

In the above passage Locke allows for two distinct types of experience. Outer experience, or sensation, provides us with ideas from the traditional five senses. Sight gives us ideas of colors, hearing gives us ideas of sounds, and so on. Thus, my idea of a particular shade of green is a product of seeing a fern. And my idea of a particular tone is the product of my being in the vicinity of a piano while it was being played. Inner experience, or reflection, is slightly more complicated. Locke thinks that the human mind is incredibly active; it is constantly performing what he calls operations. For example, I often remember past birthday parties, imagine that I was on vacation, desire a slice of pizza, or doubt that England will win the World Cup. Locke believes that we are able to notice or experience our mind performing these actions and when we do we receive ideas of reflection. These are ideas such as memory, imagination, desire, doubt, judgment, and choice.

Locke’s view is that experience (sensation and reflection) issues us with simple ideas. These are the minimal units of mental content; each simple idea is “in itself uncompounded, [and] contains in it nothing but one uniform Appearance, or Conception in the mind, and is not distinguishable into different Ideas.” (2.2.1, 119). But many of my ideas are not simple ideas. My idea of a glass of orange juice or my idea of the New York subway system, for example, could not be classed a simple ideas. Locke calls ideas like these complex ideas. His view is that complex ideas are the product of combining our simple ideas together in various ways. For example, my complex idea of a glass of orange juice consists of various simple ideas (the color orange, the feeling of coolness, a certain sweet taste, a certain acidic taste, and so forth) combined together into one object. Thus, Locke believes our ideas are compositional. Simple ideas combine to form complex ideas. And these complex ideas can be combined to form even more complex ideas.

We are now in a position to understand the character of Locke’s empiricism. He is committed to the view that all of our ideas, everything we can possibly think of, can be broken down into simple ideas received in experience. The bulk of Book II is devoted to making this empiricism plausible. Locke does this both by undertaking an examination of the various abilities that the human mind has (memory, abstraction, volition, and so forth) and by offering an account of how even abstruse ideas like space, infinity, God, and causation could be constructed using only the simple ideas received in experience.

Our complex ideas are classified into three different groups: substances, modes, and relations. Ideas of substances are ideas of things which are thought to exist independently. Ordinary objects like desks, sheep, and mountains fall into this group. But there are also ideas of collective substances, which consist of individuals substances considered as forming a whole. A group of individual buildings might be considered a town. And a group of individual men and women might be considered together as an army. In addition to describing the way we think about individual substances, Locke also has an interesting discussion of substance-in-general. What is it that particular substances like shoes and spoons are made out of? We could suggest that they are made out of leather and metal. But the question could be repeated, what are leather and metal made of? We might respond that they are made of matter. But even here, Locke thinks we can ask what matter is made of. What gives rise to the properties of matter? Locke claims that we don’t have a very clear idea here. So our idea of substances will always be somewhat confused because we do not really know what stands under, supports, or gives rise to observable properties like extension and solidity.

Ideas of modes are ideas of things which are dependent on substances in some way. In general, this taxonomic category can be somewhat tricky. It does not seem to have a clear parallel in contemporary metaphysics, and it is sometimes thought to be a mere catch-all category for things which are neither substances nor relations. But it is helpful to think of modes as being like features of substances; modes are “such complex Ideas, which however compounded, contain not in them the supposition of subsisting by themselves, but are considered as Dependences on, or Affections of Substances.” (2.12.4, 165). Modes come in two types: simple and mixed. Simple modes are constructed by combining a large number of a single type of simple ideas together. For example, Locke believes there is a simple idea of unity. Our complex idea of the number seven, for example, is a simple mode and is constructed by concatenating seven simple ideas of unity together. Locke uses this category to explain how we think about a number of topics relating to number, space, time, pleasure and pain, and cognition. Mixed modes, on the other hand, involve combining together simple ideas of more than one kind. A great many ideas fall into this category. But the most important ones are moral ideas. Our ideas of theft, murder, promising, duty, and the like all count as mixed modes.

Ideas of relations are ideas that involve more than one substance. My idea of a husband, for example, is more than the idea of an individual man. It also must include the idea of another substance, namely the idea of that man’s spouse. Locke is keen to point out that much more of our thought involves relations than we might previously have thought. For example, when I think about Elizabeth II as the Queen of England my thinking actually involves relations, because I cannot truly think of Elizabeth as a queen without conceiving of her as having a certain relationship of sovereignty to some subjects (individual substances like David Beckham and J.K. Rowling). Locke then goes on to explore the role that relations have in our thinking about causation, space, time, morality, and (very famously) identity.

Throughout his discussion of the different kinds of complex ideas Locke is keen to emphasize that all of our ideas can ultimately be broken down into simple ideas received in sensation and reflection. Put differently, Locke is keenly aware that the success of his empiricist theory of mind depends on its ability to account for all the contents of our minds. Whether or not Locke is successful is a matter of dispute. On some occasions the analysis he gives of how a very complex idea could be constructed using only simple ideas is vague and requires the reader to fill in some gaps. And commentators have also suggested that some of the simple ideas Locke invokes, for example the simple ideas of power and unity, do not seem to be obvious components of our phenomenological experience.

Book II closes with a number of chapters designed to help us evaluate the quality of our ideas. Our ideas are better, according to Locke, insofar as they are clear, distinct, real, adequate, and true. Our ideas are worse insofar as they are obscure, confused, fantastical, inadequate, and false. Clarity and obscurity are explained via an analogy to vision. Clear ideas, like clear images, are crisp and fresh, not faded or diminished in the way that obscure ideas (or images) are. Distinction and confusion have to do with the individuation of ideas. Ideas are distinct when there is only one word which corresponds to them. Confused ideas are ones to which more than one word can correctly apply or ones that lack a clear and consistent correlation to one particular word. To use one of Locke’s examples, an idea of a leopard as a beast with spots would be confused. It is not distinct because the word “lynx” could apply to that idea just as easily as the word “leopard.” Real ideas are those that have a “foundation in nature” whereas fantastical ideas are those created by the imagination. For example, our idea of a horse would be a real idea and our idea of a unicorn would be fantastical. Adequacy and inadequacy have to do with how well ideas match the patterns according to which they were made. Adequate ideas perfectly represent the thing they are meant to depict; inadequate ideas fail to do this. Ideas are true when the mind understands them in a way that is correct according to linguistic practices and the way the world is structured. They are false when the mind misunderstands them along these lines.

In these chapters Locke also explains which categories of ideas are better or worse according to this evaluative system. Simple ideas do very well. Because objects directly produce them in the mind they tend to be clear, distinct, and so forth. Ideas of modes and relations also tend to do very well, but for a different reason. Locke thinks that the archetypes of these ideas are in the mind rather than in the world. As such, it is easy for these ideas to be good because the mind has a clear sense of what the ideas should be like as it constructs them. By contrast, ideas of substances tend to fare very poorly. The archetypes for these ideas are external world objects. Because our perceptual access to these objects is limited in a number of ways and because these objects are so intricate, ideas of substances tend to be confused, inadequate, false, and so forth.

d. Language

Book III of the Essay is concerned with language. Locke admits that this topic is something of a digression. He did not originally plan for language to take up an entire book of the Essay. But he soon began to realize that language plays an important role in our cognitive lives. Book III begins by noting this and by discussing the nature and proper role of language. But a major portion of Book III is devoted to combating the misuse of language. Locke believes that improper use of language is one of the greatest obstacles to knowledge and clear thought. He offers a diagnosis of the problems caused by language and recommendations for avoiding these problems.

Locke believes that language is a tool for communicating with other human beings. Specifically, Locke thinks that we want to communicate about our ideas, the contents of our minds. From here it is a short step to the view that: “Words in their primary or immediate Signification, stand for nothing, but the Ideas in the Mind of him that uses them.” (3.2.2, 405). When an agent utters the word “gold” she is referring to her idea of a shiny, yellowish, malleable substance of great value. When she utters the word “carrot” she is referring to her idea of a long, skinny, orange vegetable which grows underground. Locke is, of course, aware that the names we choose for these ideas are arbitrary and merely a matter of social convention.

Although the primary use of words is to refer to ideas in the mind of the speaker, Locke also allows that words make what he calls “secret reference” to two other things. First, humans also want their words to refer to the corresponding ideas in the minds of other humans. When Smith says “carrot” within earshot of Jones her hope is that Jones also has an idea of the long, skinny vegetable and that saying “carrot” will bring that idea into Jones’ mind. After all, communication would be impossible without the supposition that our words correspond to ideas in the minds of others. Second, humans suppose that their words stand for objects in the world. When Smith says “carrot” she wants to refer to more than just her idea, she also wants to refer to the long skinny objects themselves. But Locke is suspicious of these two other ways of understanding signification. He thinks the latter one, in particular, is illegitimate.

After discussing these basic features of language and reference Locke goes on to discuss specific cases of the relationship between ideas and words: words used for simple ideas, words used for modes, words used for substances, the way in which a single word can refer to a multiplicity of ideas, and so forth. There is also an interesting chapter on “particles.” These are words which do not refer to an idea but instead refer to a certain connection which holds between ideas. For example, if I say “Secretariat is brown” the word “Secretariat” refers to my idea of a certain racehorse, and “brown” refers to my idea of a certain color, but the word “is” does something different. That word is a particle and indicates that I am expressing something about the relationship between my ideas of Secretariat and brown and suggesting that they are connected in a certain way. Other particles includes words like “and”, “but”, “hence”, and so forth.

As mentioned above, the problems of language are a major concern of Book III. Locke thinks that language can lead to confusion and misunderstanding for a number of reasons. The signification of words is arbitrary, rather than natural, and this means it can be difficult to understand which words refer to which ideas. Many of our words stand for ideas which are complex, hard to acquire, or both. So many people will struggle to use those words appropriately. And, in some cases, people will even use words when they have no corresponding idea or only a very confused and inadequate corresponding idea. Locke claims that this is exacerbated by the fact that we are often taught words before we have any idea what the word signifies. A child, for example, might be taught the word “government” at a young age, but it will take her years to form a clear idea of what governments are and how they operate. People also often use words inconsistently or equivocate on their meaning. Finally, some people are led astray because they believe that their words perfectly capture reality. Recall from above that people secretly and incorrectly use their words to refer to objects in the external world. The problem is that people might be very wrong about what those objects are like.

Locke thinks that a result of all this is that people are seriously misusing language and that many debates and discussions in important fields like science, politics, and philosophy are confused or consist of merely verbal disputes. Locke provides a number of examples of language causing problems: Cartesians using “body” and “extension” interchangeably, even though the two ideas are distinct; physiologists who agree on all the facts yet have a long dispute because they have different understandings of the word “liquor”; Scholastic philosophers using the term “prime matter” when they are unable to actually frame an idea of such a thing, and so forth.

The remedies that Locke recommends for fixing these problems created by language are somewhat predictable. But Locke is quick to point out that while they sound like easy fixes they are actually quite difficult to implement. The first and most important step is to only use words when we have clear ideas attached to them. (Again, this sounds easy, but many of us might actually struggle to come up with a clear idea corresponding to even everyday terms like “glory” or “fascist”.) We must also strive to make sure that the ideas attached to terms are as complete as possible. We must strive to ensure that we use words consistently and do not equivocate; every time we utter a word we should use it to signify one and the same idea. Finally, we should communicate our definitions of words to others.

e. The Account of Knowledge

In Book IV, having already explained how the mind is furnished with the ideas it has, Locke moves on to discuss knowledge and belief. A good place to start is with a quote from the beginning of Book IV: “Knowledge then seems to me to be nothing but the perception of the connexion and agreement, or disagreement and repugnancy of any of our Ideas. Where this Perception is, there is Knowledge, and where it is not, there, though we may fancy, guess, or believe, yet we always come short of Knowledge.” (4.2.2, 525). Locke spends the first part of Book IV clarifying and exploring this conception of knowledge. The second part focuses on how we should apportion belief in cases where we lack knowledge.

What does Locke mean by the “connection and agreement” and the “disagreement and repugnancy” of our ideas? Some examples might help. Bring to mind your idea of white and your idea of black. Locke thinks that upon doing this you will immediately perceive that they are different, they “disagree”. It is when you perceive this disagreement that you know the fact that white is not black. Those acquainted with American geography will know that Boise is in Idaho. On Locke’s account of knowledge, this means that they are able to perceive a certain connection that obtains between their idea of Idaho and their idea of Boise. Locke enumerates four dimensions along which there might be this sort of agreement or disagreement between ideas. First, we can perceive when two ideas are identical or non-identical. For example, knowing that sweetness is not bitterness consists in perceiving that the idea of sweetness is not identical to the idea of bitterness. Second, we can perceive relations that obtain between ideas. For example, knowing that 7 is greater than 3 consists in perceiving that there is a size relation of bigger and smaller between the two ideas. Third, we can perceive when our idea of a certain feature accompanies our idea of a certain thing. If I know that ice is cold this is because I perceive that my idea of cold always accompanies my idea of ice. Fourthly, we can perceive when existence agrees with any idea. I can have knowledge of this fourth kind when, for example, I perform the cogito and recognize the special relation between my idea of myself and my idea of existence. Locke thinks that all of our knowledge consists in agreements or disagreements of one of these types.

After detailing the types of relations between ideas which constitute knowledge Locke continues on to discuss three “degrees” of knowledge in 4.2. These degrees seem to consist in different ways of knowing something. The first degree Locke calls intuitive knowledge. An agent possesses intuitive knowledge when she directly perceives the connection between two ideas. This is the best kind of knowledge, as Locke says “Such kind of Truths, the Mind perceives at the first sight of the Ideas together, by bare Intuition, without the intervention of any other Idea; and this kind of knowledge is the clearest, and most certain, that humane Frailty is capable of.” (4.2.1, 531). The second degree of knowledge is called demonstrative. Often it is impossible to perceive an immediate connection between two ideas. For example, most of us are unable to tell that the three interior angles of a triangle are equal to two right angles simply by looking at them. But most of us, with the assistance of a mathematics teacher, can be made to see that they are equal by means of a geometric proof or demonstration. This is the model for demonstrative knowledge. Even if one is unable to directly perceive a relation between idea-X and idea-Y one might perceive a relation indirectly by means of idea-A and idea-B. This will be possible if the agent has intuitive knowledge of a connection between X and A, between A and B, and then between B and Y. Demonstrative knowledge consists, therefore, in a string of relations each of which is known intuitively.

The third degree of knowledge is called sensitive knowledge and has been the source of considerable debate and confusion among Locke commentators. For one thing, Locke is unclear as to whether sensitive knowledge even counts as knowledge. He writes that intuitive and demonstrative knowledge are, properly speaking, the only forms of knowledge, but that “There is, indeed, another Perception of the Mind…which going beyond bare probability, and yet not reaching perfectly to either of the foregoing degrees of certainty, passes under the name of Knowledge.” (4.2.14, 537). Sensitive knowledge has to do with the relationship between our ideas and the objects in the external world that produce them. Locke claims that we can be certain that when we perceive something, an orange, for example, there is an object in the external world which is responsible for these sensations. Part of Locke’s claim is that there is a serious qualitative difference between biting into an orange and remembering biting into an orange. There is something in the phenomenological experience of the former which assures us of a corresponding object in the external world.

Locke spends a fair amount of time in Book IV responding to worries that he is a skeptic or that his account of knowledge, with its emphasis on ideas, fails to be responsive to the external world. The general worry for Locke is fairly simple. By claiming that ideas are the only things humans have epistemic access to, and by claiming that knowledge relates only to our ideas, Locke seems to rule out the claim that we can ever know about the external world. Lockean agents are trapped behind a “veil of ideas.” Thus we cannot have any assurance that our ideas provide us with reliable information about the external world. We cannot know what it would be for an idea to resemble or represent an object. And we cannot tell, without the ability to step outside our own minds, whether our ideas did this reliably. This criticism has historically been thought to endanger Locke’s entire project. Gilbert Ryle’s memorable assessment is that “nearly every youthful student of philosophy both can and does in his second essay refute Locke’s entire Theory of Knowledge.” Recent scholarship has been much more charitable to Locke. But the central problem is still a pressing one.

Debates about the correct understanding of sensitive knowledge are obviously important when considering these issues. At first blush, the relation involved in sensitive knowledge seems to be a relation between an idea and a physical object in the world. But, if this reading is correct, then it becomes difficult to understand the many passages in which Locke insists that knowledge is a relation that holds only between ideas. Also relevant are debates about how to correctly understand Lockean ideas. Recall from above that although many understand ideas as mental objects, some understand them as mental acts. While most of the text seems to favor the first interpretation, it seems that the second interpretation has a significant advantage when responding to these skeptical worries. The reason is that the connection between ideas and external world objects is built right into the definition of an idea. An idea just is a perception of an external world object.

However the debates discussed in the previous paragraph are resolved, there is a consensus among commentators that Locke believes the scope of human understanding is very narrow. Humans are not capable of very much knowledge. Locke discusses this is 4.3, a chapter entitled “Extent of Humane Knowledge.” The fact that our knowledge is so limited should come as no surprise. We have already discussed the ways in which our ideas of substances are problematic. And we have just seen that we have no real understanding of the connection between our ideas and the objects that produce them.

The good news, however, is that while our knowledge might not be very extensive, it is sufficient for our needs. Locke’s memorable nautical metaphor holds that: “’Tis of great use to the Sailor to know the length of his Line, though he cannot with it fathom all the depths of the Ocean. ‘Tis well he knows, that it is long enough to reach the bottom, at such Places, as are necessary to direct his Voyage, and caution him against running upon Shoales, that may ruin him. Our Business here is not to know all things, but those which concern our Conduct.” (1.1.6, 46). Locke thinks we have enough knowledge to live comfortable lives on Earth, to realize that there is a God, to understand morality and behave appropriately, and to gain salvation. Our knowledge of morality, in particular, is very good. Locke even suggests that we might develop a demonstrable system of morality similar to Euclid’s demonstrable system of geometry. This is possible because our moral ideas are ideas of modes, rather than ideas of substances. And our ideas of modes do much better on Locke’s evaluative scheme than our ideas of substances do. Finally, while the limits to our knowledge might be disappointing, Locke notes that recognizing these limits is important and useful insofar as it will help us to better organize our intellectual inquiry. We will be saved from investigating questions which we could never know the answers to and can focus our efforts on areas where progress is possible.

One benefit of Locke’s somewhat bleak assessment of the scope of our knowledge was that it caused him to focus on an area which was underappreciated by many of his contemporaries. This was the arena of judgment or opinion, belief states which fall short of knowledge. Given that we have so little knowledge (that we can be certain of so little) the realm of probability becomes very important. Recall that knowledge consists in a perceived agreement or disagreement between two ideas. Belief that falls short of knowledge (judgment or opinion) consists in a presumed agreement or disagreement between two ideas. Consider an example: I am not entirely sure who the Prime Minister of Canada is, but I am somewhat confident it is Stephen Harper. Locke’s claim is that in judging that the Canadian PM is Stephen Harper I am acting as though a relation holds between the two ideas. I do not directly perceive a connection between my idea of Stephen Harper and my idea of the Canadian PM, but I presume that one exists.

After offering this account of what judgment is, Locke offers an analysis of how and why we form the opinions we do and offers some recommendations for forming our opinions responsibly. This includes a diagnosis of the errors people make in judging, a discussion of the different degrees of assent, and an interesting discussion of the epistemic value of testimony.

3. Special Topics in the Essay

As discussed above, the main project of the Essay is an examination of the human understanding and an analysis of knowledge. But the Essay is a rather expansive work and contains discussion of many other topics of philosophical interest. Some of these will be discussed below. A word of warning, however, is required before proceeding. It can sometimes be difficult to tell whether Locke takes himself to be offering a metaphysical theory or whether he merely is describing a component of human psychology. For example, we might question whether his account of personal identity is meant to give necessary and sufficient conditions for a metaphysical account of personhood or whether it is merely designed to tell us what sorts of identity attributions we do and should make and why. We may further question whether, when discussing primary and secondary qualities, Locke is offering a theory about how perception really works or whether this discussion is a mere digression used to illustrate a point about the nature of our ideas. So while many of these topics have received a great deal of attention, their precise relationship to the main project of the Essay can be difficult to locate.

a. Primary and Secondary Qualities

Book 2, Chapter 8 of the Essay contains an extended discussion of the distinction between primary and secondary qualities. Locke was hardly original in making this distinction. By the time the Essay was published, it had been made by many others and was even somewhat commonplace. That said, Locke’s formulation of the distinction and his analysis of the related issues has been tremendously influential and has provided the framework for much of the subsequent discussion on the topic.

Locke defines a quality as a power that a body has to produce ideas in us. So a simple object like a baked potato which can produce ideas of brownness, heat, ovular shape, solidity, and determinate size must have a series of corresponding qualities. There must be something in the potato which gives us the idea of brown, something in the potato which gives us the idea of ovular shape, and so on. The primary/secondary quality distinction claims that some of these qualities are very different from others.

Locke motivates the distinction between two types of qualities by discussing how a body could produce an idea in us. The theory of perception endorsed by Locke is highly mechanical. All perception occurs as a result of motion and collision. If I smell the baked potato, there must be small material particles which are flying off of the potato and bumping into nerves in my nose, the motion in the nose-nerves causes a chain reaction along my nervous system until eventually there is some motion in my brain and I experience the idea of a certain smell. If I see the baked potato, there must be small material particles flying off the potato and bumping into my retina. That bumping causes a similar chain reaction which ends in my experience of a certain roundish shape.

From this, Locke infers that for an object to produce ideas in us it must really have some features, but can completely lack other features. This mechanical theory of perception requires that objects producing ideas in us have shape, extension, mobility, and solidity. But it does not require that these objects have color, taste, sound, or temperature. So the primary qualities are qualities actually possessed by bodies. These are features that a body cannot be without. The secondary qualities, by contrast, are not really had by bodies. They are just ways of talking about the ideas that can be produced in us by bodies in virtue of their primary qualities. So when we claim that the baked potato is solid, this means that solidity is one of its fundamental features. But when I claim that it smells a certain earthy kind of way, this just means that its fundamental features are capable of producing the idea of the earthy smell in my mind.

These claims lead to Locke’s claims about resemblance: “From whence I think it is easie to draw this Observation, That the Ideas of primary Qualities of Bodies, are Resemblances of them, and their Patterns do really exist in the Bodies themselves; but the Ideas, produced in us by these Secondary Qualities, have no resemblance of them at all.” (2.8.14, 137). Insofar as my idea of the potato is of something solid, extended, mobile, and possessing a certain shape my idea accurately captures something about the real nature of the potato. But insofar as my idea of the potato is of something with a particular smell, temperature, and taste my ideas do not accurately capture mind-independent facts about the potato.

b. Mechanism

Around the time of the Essay the mechanical philosophy was emerging as the predominant theory about the physical world. The mechanical philosophy held that the fundamental entities in the physical world were small individual bodies called corpuscles. Each corpuscle was solid, extended, and had a certain shape. These corpuscles could combine together to form ordinary objects like rocks, tables, and plants. The mechanical philosophy argued that all features of bodies and all natural phenomena could be explained by appeal to these corpuscles and their basic properties (in particular, size, shape, and motion).

Locke was exposed to the mechanical philosophy while at Oxford and became acquainted with the writings of its most prominent advocates. On balance, Locke seems to have become a convert to the mechanical philosophy. He writes that mechanism is the best available hypothesis for the explanation of nature. We have already seen some of the explanatory work done by mechanism in the Essay. The distinction between primary and secondary qualities was a hallmark of the mechanical philosophy and neatly dovetailed with mechanist accounts of perception. Locke reaffirms his commitment to this account of perception at a number of other points in the Essay. And when discussing material objects Locke is very often happy to allow that they are composed of material corpuscles. What is peculiar, however, is that while the Essay does seem to have a number of passages in which Locke supports mechanical explanations and speaks highly of mechanism, it also contains some highly critical remarks about mechanism and discussions of the limits of the mechanical philosophy.

Locke’s critiques of mechanism can be divided into two strands. First, he recognized that there were a number of observed phenomena which mechanism struggled to explain. Mechanism did offer neat explanations of some observed phenomena. For example, the fact that objects could be seen but not smelled through glass could be explained by positing that the corpuscles which interacted with our retinas were smaller than the ones which interacted with our nostrils. So the sight corpuscles could pass through the spaces between the glass corpuscles, but the smell corpuscles would be turned away. But other phenomena were harder to explain. Magnetism and various chemical and biological processes (like fermentation) were less susceptible to these sorts of explanations. And universal gravitation, which Locke took Newton to have proved the existence of in the Principia, was particularly hard to explain. Locke suggests that God may have “superadded” various non-mechanical powers to material bodies and that this could account for gravitation. (Indeed, at several points he even suggests that God may have superadded the power of thought to matter and that humans might be purely material beings.)

Locke’s second set of critiques pertain to theoretical problems in the mechanical philosophy. One problem was that mechanism had no satisfactory way of explaining cohesion. Why do corpuscles sometimes stick together? If things like tables and chairs are just collections of small corpuscles then they should be very easy to break apart, the same way I can easily separate one group of marbles from another. Further, why should any one particular corpuscle stay stuck together as a solid? What accounts for its cohesion? Again, mechanism seems hard-pressed to offer an answer. Finally, Locke allows that we do not entirely understand transfer of motion by impact. When one corpuscle collides with another we actually do not have a very satisfying explanation for why the second moves away under the force of the impact.

Locke presses these critiques with some skill and in a serious manner. Still, ultimately he is guardedly optimistic about mechanism. This somewhat mixed attitude on Locke’s part has led commentators to debate questions about his exact attitude toward the mechanical philosophy and his motivations for discussing it.

c. Volition and Agency

In Book 2, Chapter 21 of the Essay Locke explores the topic of the will. One of the things which separates people from rocks and billiard balls is our ability to make decisions and control our actions. We feel that we are free in certain respects and that we have the power to choose certain thoughts and actions. Locke calls this power the will. But there are tricky questions about what this power consists in and about what it takes to freely (or voluntarily) choose something. 2.21 contains a delicate and sustained discussion of these tricky questions.

Locke first begins with questions of freedom and then proceeds to a discussion of the will. On Locke’s analysis, we are free to do those things which we both will to do and are physically capable of doing. For example, if I wish to jump into a lake and have no physical maladies which prevent it, then I am free to jump into the lake. By contrast, if I do not wish to jump into the lake, but a friend pushes me in, I did not act freely when I entered the water. Or, if I wish to jump into the lake, but have a spinal injury and cannot move my body, then I do not act freely when I stay on the shore. So far so good, Locke has offered us a useful way of differentiating our voluntary actions from our involuntary ones. But there is still a pressing question about freedom and the will: that of whether the will is itself free. When I am deciding whether or not to jump into the water, is the will determined by outside factors to choose one or the other? Or can it, so to speak, make up its own mind and choose either option?

Locke’s initial position in the chapter is that the will is determined. But in later sections he offers a qualification of sorts. In normal circumstances, the will is determined by what Locke calls uneasiness: “What is it that determines the Will in regard to our Actions? … some (and for the most part the most pressing) uneasiness a Man is at present under. That is that which successively determines the Will, and sets us upon those Actions, we perform.” (2.21.31, 250-1). The uneasiness is caused by the absence of something that is perceived as good. The perception of the thing as good gives rise to a desire for that thing. Suppose I choose to eat a slice of pizza. Locke would say I must have made this choice because the absence of the pizza was troubling me somehow (I was feeling hunger pains, or longing for something savory) and this discomfort gave rise to a desire for food. That desire in turn determined my will to choose to eat pizza.

Locke’s qualification to this account of the will being determined by uneasiness has to do with what he calls suspension. Beginning with the second edition of the Essay, Locke began to argue that the most pressing desire for the most part determines the will, but not always: “For the mind having in most cases, as is evident in Experience, a power to suspend the execution and satisfaction of any of its desires, and so all, one after another, is at liberty to consider the objects of them; examine them on all sides, and weigh them with others.” (2.21.47, 263). So even if, at this moment, my desire for pizza is the strongest desire, Locke thinks I can pause before I decide to eat the pizza and consider the decision. I can consider other items in my desire set: my desire to lose weight, or to leave the pizza for my friend, or to keep a vegan diet. Careful consideration of these other possibilities might have the effect of changing my desire set. If I really focus on how important it is to stay fit and healthy by eating nutritious foods then my desire to leave the pizza might become stronger than my desire to eat it and my will may be determined to choose to not eat the pizza. But of course we can always ask whether a person has a choice whether or not to suspend judgment or whether the suspension of judgment is itself determined by the mind’s strongest desire. On this point Locke is somewhat vague. While most interpreters think our desires determine when judgment is suspended, some others disagree and argue that suspension of judgment offers Lockean agents a robust form of free will.

d. Personhood and Personal Identity

Locke was one of the first philosophers to give serious attention to the question of personal identity. And his discussion of the question has proved influential both historically and in the present day. The discussion occurs in the midst of Locke’ larger discussion of the identity conditions for various entities in Book II, Chapter 27. At heart, the question is simple, what makes me the same person as the person who did certain things in the past and that will do certain things in the future? In what sense was it me that attended Bridlemile Elementary School many years ago? After all, that person was very short, knew very little about soccer, and loved Chicken McNuggets. I, on the other hand, am average height, know tons of soccer trivia, and get rather queasy at the thought of eating chicken, especially in nugget form. Nevertheless, it is true that I am identical to the boy who attended Bridlemile.

In Locke’s time, the topic of personal identity was important for religious reasons. Christian doctrine held that there was an afterlife in which virtuous people would be rewarded in heaven and sinful people would be punished in hell. This scheme provided motivation for individuals to behave morally. But, for this to work, it was important that the person who is rewarded or punished is the same person as the one who lived virtuously or lived sinfully. And this had to be true even though the person being rewarded or punished had died, had somehow continued to exist in an afterlife, and had somehow managed to be reunited with a body. So it was important to get the issue of personal identity right.

Locke’s views on personal identity involve a negative project and a positive project. The negative project involves arguing against the view that personal identity consists in or requires the continued existence of a particular substance. And the positive project involves defending the view that personal identity consists in continuity of consciousness. We can begin with this positive view. Locke defines a person as “a thinking intelligent Being, that has reason and reflection, and can consider itself as itself, the same thinking thing in different times and places; which it does only by that consciousness, which is inseparable from thinking, and as it seems to me essential to it.” (2.27.9, 335).  Locke suggests here that part of what makes a person the same through time is their ability to recognize past experiences as belonging to them. For me, part of what differentiates one little boy who attended Bridlemile Elementary from all the other children who went there is my realization that I share in his consciousness. Put differently, my access to his lived experience at Bridlemile is very different from my access to the lived experiences of others there: it is first-personal and immediate. I recognize his experiences there as part of a string of experiences that make up my life and join up to my current self and current experiences in a unified way. That is what makes him the same person as me.

Locke believes that this account of personal identity as continuity of consciousness obviates the need for an account of personal identity given in terms of substances. A traditional view held that there was a metaphysical entity, the soul, which guaranteed personal identity through time; wherever there was the same soul, the same person would be there as well. Locke offers a number of thought experiments to cast doubt on this belief and show that his account is superior. For example, if a soul was wiped clean of all its previous experiences and given new ones (as might be the case if reincarnation were true), the same soul would not justify the claim that all of those who had had it were the same person. Or, we could imagine two souls who had their conscious experiences completely swapped. In this case, we would want to say that the person went with the conscious experiences and did not remain with the soul.

Locke’s account of personal identity seems to be a deliberate attempt to move away from some of the metaphysical alternatives and to offer an account which would be acceptable to individuals from a number of different theological backgrounds. Of course, a number of serious challenges have been raised for Locke’s account.. Most of these focus on the crucial role seemingly played by memory. And the precise details of Locke’s positive proposal in 2.27 have been hard to pin down. Nevertheless, many contemporary philosophers believe that there is an important kernel of truth in Locke’s analysis.

e. Real and Nominal Essences

Locke’s distinction between the real essence of a substance and the nominal essence of a substance is one of the most fascinating components of the Essay. Scholastic philosophers had held that the main goal of metaphysics and science was to learn about the essences of things: the key metaphysical components of things which explained all of their interesting features. Locke thought this project was misguided. That sort of knowledge, knowledge of the real essences of beings, was unavailable to human beings. This led Locke to suggest an alternative way to understand and investigate nature; he recommends focusing on the nominal essences of things.

When Locke introduces the term real essence he uses it to refer to the “real constitution of any Thing, which is the foundation of all those Properties, that are combined in, and are constantly found to co-exist with [an object]” (3.6.6, 442). For the Scholastics this real essence would be an object’s substantial form. For proponents of the mechanical philosophy it would be the number and arrangement of the material corpuscles which composed the body. Locke sometimes endorses this latter understanding of real essence. But he insists that these real essences are entirely unknown and undiscoverable by us. The nominal essences, by contrast, are known and are the best way we have to understand individual substances. Nominal essences are just collections of all the observed features an individual thing has. So the nominal essence of a piece of gold would include the ideas of yellowness, a certain weight, malleability, dissolvability in certain chemicals, and so on.

Locke offers us a helpful analogy to illustrate the difference between real and nominal essences. He suggests that our position with respect to ordinary objects is like the position of someone looking at a very complicated clock. The gears, wheels, weights, and pendulum that produce the motions of the hands on the clock face (the clock’s real essence) are unknown to the person. They are hidden behind the casing. He or she can only know about the observable features like the clock’s shape, the movement of the hands, and the chiming of the hours (the clock’s nominal essence). Similarly, when I look at an object like a dandelion, I am only able to observe its nominal essence (the yellow color, the bitter smell, and so forth). I have no clear idea what produces these features of the dandelion or how they are produced.

Locke’s views on real and nominal essences have important consequences for his views about the division of objects into groups and sorts. Why do we consider some things to be zebras and other things to be rabbits? Locke’s view is that we group according to nominal essence, not according to (unknown) real essence. But this has the consequence that our groupings might fail to adequately reflect whatever real distinctions there might be in nature. So Locke is not a realist about species or types. Instead, he is a conventionalist. We project these divisions on the world when we choose to classify objects as falling under the various nominal essences we’ve created.

f. Religious Epistemology

The epistemology of religion (claims about our understanding of God and our duties with respect to him) were tremendously contentious during Locke’s lifetime. The English Civil War, fought during Locke’s youth, was in large part a disagreement over the right way to understand the Christian religion and the requirements of religious faith. Throughout the seventeenth century, a number of fundamentalist Christian sects continually threatened the stability of English political life. And the status of Catholic and Jewish people in England was a vexed one.

So the stakes were very high when, in 4.18, Locke discussed the nature of faith and reason and their respective domains. He defines reason as an attempt to discover certainty or probability through the use of our natural faculties in the investigation of the world. Faith, by contrast, is certainty or probability attained through a communication believed to have come, originally, from God. So when Smith eats a potato chip and comes to believe it is salty, she believes this according to reason. But when Smith believes that Joshua made the sun stand still in the sky because she read it in the Bible (which she takes to be divine revelation), she believes according to faith.

Although it initially sounds as though Locke has carved out quite separate roles for faith and reason, it must be noted that these definitions make faith subordinate to reason in a subtle way. For, as Locke explains: “Whatever GOD hath revealed, is certainly true; no Doubt can be made of it. This is the proper Object of Faith: But whether it be a divine Revelation, or no, Reason must judge; which can never permit the Mind to reject a greater Evidence to embrace what is less evident, nor allow it to entertain Probability in opposition to Knowledge and Certainty.” (4.18.10, 695). First, Locke thinks that if any proposition, even one which purports to be divinely revealed, clashes with the clear evidence of reason then it should not be believed. So, even if it seems like God is telling us that 1+1=3, Locke claims we should go on believing that 1+1=2 and we should deny that the 1+1=3 revelation was genuine. Second, Locke thinks that to determine whether or not something is divinely revealed we have to exercise our reason. How can we tell whether the Bible contains God’s direct revelation conveyed through the inspired Biblical authors or whether it is instead the work of mere humans? Only reason can help us settle that question. Locke thinks that those who ignore the importance of reason in determining what is and is not a matter of faith are guilty of “enthusiasm.” And in a chapter added to later editions of the Essay Locke sternly warns his readers against the serious dangers posed by this intellectual vice.

In all of this Locke emerges as a strong moderate. He himself was deeply religious and took religious faith to be important. But he also felt that there were serious limits to what could be justified through appeals to faith. The issues discussed in this section will be very important below where Locke’s views on the importance of religious toleration are discussed.

4. Political Philosophy

Locke lived during a very eventful time in English politics. The Civil War, Interregnum, Restoration, Exclusion Crisis, and Glorious Revolution all happened during his lifetime. For much of his life Locke held administrative positions in government and paid very careful attention to contemporary debates in political theory. So it is perhaps unsurprising that he wrote a number of works on political issues. In this field, Locke is best known for his arguments in favor of religious toleration and limited government. Today these ideas are commonplace and widely accepted. But in Locke’s time they were highly innovative, even radical.

a. The Two Treatises

Locke’s Two Treatises of Government were published in 1689. It was originally thought that they were intended to defend the Glorious Revolution and William’s seizure of the throne. We now know, however, that they were in fact composed much earlier. Nonetheless, they do lay out a view of government amenable to many of William’s supporters.

The First Treatise is now of primarily historical interest. It takes the form of a detailed critique of a work called Patriacha by Robert Filmer. Filmer had argued, in a rather unsophisticated way, in favor of divine right monarchy. On his view, the power of kings ultimately originated in the dominion which God gave to Adam and which had passed down in an unbroken chain through the ages. Locke disputes this picture on a number of historical grounds. Perhaps more importantly, Locke also distinguishes between a number of different types of dominion or governing power which Filmer had run together.

After clearing some ground in the First Treatise, Locke offers a positive view of the nature of government in the much better known Second Treatise. Part of Locke’s strategy in this work was to offer a different account of the origins of government. While Filmer had suggested that humans had always been subject to political power, Locke argues for the opposite. According to him, humans were initially in a state of nature. The state of nature was apolitical in the sense that there were no governments and each individual retained all of his or her natural rights. People possessed these natural rights (including the right to attempt to preserve one’s life, to seize unclaimed valuables, and so forth) because they were given by God to all of his people.

The state of nature was inherently unstable. Individuals would be under contrast threat of physical harm. And they would be unable to pursue any goals that required stability and widespread cooperation with other humans. Locke’s claim is that government arose in this context. Individuals, seeing the benefits which could be gained, decided to relinquish some of their rights to a central authority while retaining other rights. This took the form of a contract. In agreement for relinquishing certain rights, individuals would receive protection from physical harm, security for their possessions, and the ability to interact and cooperate with other humans in a stable environment.

So, according to this view, governments were instituted by the citizens of those governments. This has a number of very important consequences. On this view, rulers have an obligation to be responsive to the needs and desires of these citizens. Further, in establishing a government the citizens had relinquished some, but not all of their original rights. So no ruler could claim absolute power over all elements of a citizen’s life. This carved out important room for certain individual rights or liberties. Finally, and perhaps most importantly, a government which failed to adequately protect the rights and interests of its citizens or a government which attempted to overstep its authority would be failing to perform the task for which it was created. As such, the citizens would be entitled to revolt and replace the existing government with one which would suitably carry out the duties of ensuring peace and civil order while respecting individual rights.

So Locke was able to use the account of natural rights and a government created through contract to accomplish a number of important tasks. He could use it to show why individuals retain certain rights even when they are subject to a government. He could use it to show why despotic governments which attempted to unduly infringe on the rights of their citizens were bad. And he could use it to show that citizens had a right to revolt in instances where governments failed in certain ways. These are powerful ideas which remain important even today.

For more. see the article Political Philosophy.

b. Property

Locke’s Second Treatise on government contains an influential account of the nature of private property. According to Locke, God gave humans the world and its contents to have in common. The world was to provide humans with what was necessary for the continuation and enjoyment of life. But Locke also believed it was possible for individuals to appropriate individual parts of the world and justly hold them for their own exclusive use. Put differently, Locke believed that we have a right to acquire private property.

Locke’s claim is that we acquire property by mixing our labor with some natural resource. For example, if I discover some grapes growing on a vine, through my labor in picking and collecting these grapes I acquire an ownership right over them. If I find an empty field and then use my labor to plow the field then plant and raise crops, I will be the proper owner of those crops. If I chop down trees in an unclaimed forest and use the wood to fashion a table, then that table will be mine. Locke places two important limitations on the way in which property can be acquired by mixing one’s labor with natural resources. First, there is what has come to be known as the Waste Proviso. One must not take so much property that some of it goes to waste. I should not appropriate gallons and gallons of grapes if I am only able to eat a few and the rest end up rotting. If the goods of the Earth were given to us by God, it would be inappropriate to allow some of this gift to go to waste. Second, there is the Enough-And-As-Good Proviso. This says that in appropriating resources I am required to leave enough and as good for others to appropriate. If the world was left to us in common by God, it would be wrong of me to appropriate more than my fair share and fail to leave sufficient resources for others.

After currency is introduced and after governments are established the nature of property obviously changes a great deal. Using metal, which can be made into coins and which does not perish the way foodstuffs and other goods do, individuals are able to accumulate much more wealth than would be possible otherwise. So the proviso concerning waste seems to drop away. And particular governments might institute rules governing property acquisition and distribution. Locke was aware of this and devoted a great deal of thought to the nature of property and the proper distribution of property within a commonwealth. His writings on economics, monetary policy, charity, and social welfare systems are evidence of this. But Locke’s views on property inside of a commonwealth have received far less attention than his views on the original acquisition of property in the state of nature.

c. Toleration

Locke had been systematically thinking about issues relating to religious toleration since his early years in London and even though he only published his Epistola de Tolerantia (A Letter Concerning Toleration) in 1689 he had finished writing it several years before. The question of whether or not a state should attempt to prescribe one particular religion within the state, what means states might use to do so, and what the correct attitude should be toward those who resist conversion to the official state religion had been central to European politics ever since the Protestant Reformation. Locke’s time in England, France, and the Netherlands had given him experiences of three very different approaches to these questions. These experiences had convinced him that, for the most part, individuals should be allowed to practice their religion without interference from the state. Indeed, part of the impetus for the publication of Locke’s Letter Concerning Toleration came from Louis XIV’s revocation of the Edict of Nantes, which took away the already limited rights of Protestants in France and exposed them to state persecution.

It is possible to see Locke’s arguments in favor of toleration as relating both to the epistemological views of the Essay and the political views of the Two Treatises. Relating to Locke’s epistemological views, recall from above that Locke thought the scope of human knowledge was extremely restricted. We might not be particularly good at determining what the correct religion is. There is no reason to think that those holding political power will be any better at discovering the true religion than anyone else, so they should not attempt to enforce their views on others. Instead, each individual should be allowed to pursue true beliefs as best as they are able. Little harm results from allowing others to have their own religious beliefs.  Indeed, it might be beneficial to allow a plurality of beliefs because one group might end up with the correct beliefs and win others over to their side.

Relating to Locke’s political views, as expressed in the Two Treatises, Locke endorses toleration on the grounds that the enforcement of religious conformity is outside the proper scope of government. People consent to governments for the purpose of establishing social order and the rule of law. Governments should refrain from enforcing religious conformity because doing so is unnecessary and irrelevant for these ends. Indeed, attempting to enforce conformity may positively harm these ends as it will likely lead to resistance from members of prohibited religions. Locke also suggests that governments should tolerate the religious beliefs of individual citizens because enforcing religious belief is actually impossible. Acceptance of a certain religion is an inward act, a function of one’s beliefs. But governments are designed to control people’s actions. So governments are, in many ways, ill-equipped to enforce the adoption of a particular religion because individual people have an almost perfect control of their own thoughts.

While Locke’s views on toleration were very progressive for the time and while his views do have an affinity with our contemporary consensus on the value of religious toleration it is important to recognize that Locke did place some severe limits on toleration. He did not think that we should tolerate the intolerant, those who would seek to forcibly impose their religious views on others. Similarly, any religious group who posed a threat to political stability or public safety should not be tolerated. Importantly, Locke included Roman Catholics in this group. On his view, Catholics had a fundamental allegiance to the Pope, a foreign prince who did not recognize the sovereignty of English law. This made Catholics a threat to civil government and peace. Finally, Locke also believed that atheists should not be tolerated. Because they did not believe they would be rewarded or punished for their actions in an afterlife, Locke did not think they could be trusted to behave morally or maintain their contractual obligations.

5. Theology

We have already seen that in the Essay Locke developed an account of belief according to faith and belief according to reason. Recall that an agent believes according to reason when she discovers something through the use of her natural faculties and she believes according to faith when she takes something as truth because she understands it to be a message from God. Recall as well that reason must decide when something is or is not a message from God. The goal of Locke’s The Reasonableness of Christianity is to show that it is reasonable to be a Christian. Locke argues that we do have sufficient reason to think that the central truths of Christianity were communicated to us by God through his messenger, Jesus of Nazareth.

For Locke’s project to succeed he needed to show that Jesus provided his original followers with sufficient evidence that he was a legitimate messenger from God. Given that numerous individuals in history had purported to be the recipients of divine revelation, there must be something special which set Jesus apart. Locke offers two considerations in this regard. The first is that Jesus fulfilled a number of historical predictions concerning the coming of a Messiah. The second is that Jesus performed a number of miracles which attest that he had a special relationship to God. Locke also claims that we have sufficient reason to believe that these miracles actually occurred on the basis of testimony from those who witnessed them first-hand and a reliable chain of reporting from Jesus’ time into our own. This argument leads Locke into a discussion of the types and value of testimony which many philosophers have found to be interesting in its own right.

One striking feature of The Reasonableness of Christianity is the requirement for salvation that Locke endorses. Disputes about which precise beliefs were necessary for salvation and eternal life in Heaven were at the core of much religious disagreement in Locke’s time. Different denominations and sects claimed that they, and often only they, had the correct beliefs. Locke, by contrast, argued that to be a true Christian and worthy of salvation an individual only need to believe one simple truth: that Jesus is the Messiah. Of course, Locke believed there were many other important truths in the Bible. But he thought these other truths, especially those contained in the Epistles rather than the Gospels, could be difficult to interpret and could lead to disputes and disagreement. The core tenet of Christianity, however, that Jesus is the Messiah, was a mandatory belief.

In making the requirements for Christian faith and salvation so minimal Locke was part of a growing faction in the Church of England. These individuals, often known as latitudinarians, were deliberately attempting to construct a more irenic Christianity with the goal of avoiding the conflict and controversy that previous internecine fights had produced. So Locke was hardly alone in attempting to find a set of core Christian commitments which were free of sectarian theological baggage. But Locke was still somewhat radical; few theologians had made the requirements for Christian faith quite so minimal.

6. Education

Locke was regarded by many in his time as an expert on educational matters. He taught many students at Oxford and also served as a private tutor. Locke’s correspondence shows that he was constantly asked to recommend tutors and offer pedagogical advice. Locke’s expertise led to his most important work on the subject: Some Thoughts Concerning Education. The work had its origins in a series of letters Locke wrote to Edward Clarke offering advice on the education of Clarke’s children and was first published in 1693.

Locke’s views on education were, for the time, quite forward-looking. Classical languages, usually learned through tedious exercises involving rote memorization, and corporeal punishment were two predominant features of the seventeenth century English educational system. Locke saw little use for either. Instead, he emphasized the importance of teaching practical knowledge. He recognized that children learn best when they are engaged with the subject matter. Locke also foreshadowed some contemporary pedagogical views by suggesting that children should be allowed some self-direction in their course of study and should have the ability to pursue their interests.

Locke believed it was important to take great care in educating the young. He recognized that habits and prejudices formed in youth could be very hard to break in later life. Thus, much of Some Thoughts Concerning Education focuses on morality and the best ways to inculcate virtue and industry. Locke rejected authoritarian approaches. Instead, he favored methods that would help children to understand the difference between right and wrong and to cultivate a moral sense of their own.

7. Locke’s Influence

The Essay was quickly recognized as an important philosophical contribution both by its admirers and by its critics. Before long it had been incorporated into the curriculum at Oxford and Cambridge and its translation into both Latin and French garnered it an audience on the Continent as well. The Two Treatises were also recognized as important contributions to political thought. While the work had some success in England among those favorably disposed to the Glorious Revolution, its primary impact was abroad. During the American Revolution (and to a lesser extent, during the French Revolution) Locke’s views were often appealed to by those seeking to establish more representative forms of government.

Related to this last point, Locke came to be seen, alongside his friend Newton, as an embodiment of Enlightenment values and ideals. Newtonian science would lay bare the workings of nature and lead to important technological advances. Lockean philosophy would lay bare the workings of men’s minds and lead to important reforms in law and government. Voltaire played an instrumental role in shaping this legacy for Locke and worked hard to publicize Locke’s views on reason, toleration, and limited government. Locke also came to be seen as an inspiration for the Deist movement. Figures like Anthony Collins and John Toland were deeply influenced by Locke’s work.

Locke is often recognized as the founder of British Empiricism and it is true that Locke laid the foundation for much of English-language philosophy in the 18th and early 19th centuries. But those who followed in his footsteps were not unquestioning followers. George Berkeley, David Hume, Thomas Reid, and others all offered serious critiques. In recent decades, readers have attempted to offer more charitable reconstructions of Locke’s philosophy. Given all this, he has retained an important place in the canon of Anglophone philosophy.

8. References and Further Reading

a. Locke’s Works

  • Laslett, P. [ed.] 1988. Two Treatises of Government. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Locke, J. 1823. The Works of John Locke. London: Printed for T. Tegg (10 volumes).
  • Locke, J. The Clarendon Edition of the Works of John Locke, Oxford University Press, 2015. This edition includes the following volumes:
  • Nidditch, P. [ed.] 1975. An Essay Concerning Human Understanding.
  • Nidditch, P. and G.A.J. Rogers [eds.] 1990. Drafts for the Essay Concerning Human Understanding.
  • Yolton, J.W. and J.S. Yolton. [eds.] 1989. Some Thoughts Concerning Education.
  • Higgins-Biddle, J.C. [ed.] 1999. The Reasonableness of Christianity.
  • Milton, J.R. and P. Milton. [eds.] 2006. An Essay Concerning Toleration.
  • de Beer, E.S. [ed.] 1976-1989. The Correspondence of John Locke. (8 volumes).
  • von Leyden, W. [ed.] 1954. Essays on the Law of Nature. Oxford: Clarendon Press.

b. Recommended Reading

The following are recommendations for further reading on Locke. Each work has a brief statement indicating the contents

  • Anstey, P. 2011. John Locke & Natural Philosophy. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • A thorough examination of Locke’s scientific and medical thinking.
  • Ayers, M.  1993. Locke: Epistemology and Ontology. New York: Routledge.
  • A classic in Locke studies. Explores philosophical topics in the Essay and discusses Locke’s project as a whole. One volume on epistemology and one on metaphysics.
  • Chappell, V. 1994. The Cambridge Companion to Locke. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • A series of essays focusing on all aspects of Locke’s thought.
  • LoLordo, A. 2012. Locke’s Moral Man. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • An exploration and discussion of themes at the intersection of Locke’s moral and political thought. Focuses particularly on agency, personhood, and rationality.
  • Lowe, E.J. 2005. Locke. New York: Routledge.
  • An introductory overview of Locke’s philosophical and political thought.
  • Mackie, J.L. 1976. Problems from Locke.  Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Uses Locke’s work to raise and discuss a number of philosophical issues and puzzles.
  • Newman, L. 2007. The Cambridge Companion to Locke’s Essay Concerning Human Understanding. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • A series of essays focusing on specific issues in Locke’s Essay.
  • Pyle, A.J. 2013. Locke. London: Polity.
  • An excellent and brief introduction to Locke’s thought and historical context. A very good place to start for beginners.
  • Rickless, S. 2014. Locke. Malden, MA: Blackwell.
  • An introductory overview of Locke’s philosophical and political thought.
  • Stuart, M. 2013. Locke’s Metaphysics. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • An in-depth treatment of metaphysical issues and problems in the Essay.
  • Waldron, J. 2002. God, Locke, and Equality: Christian Foundation of Locke’s Political Thought. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • An examination of some key issues in Locke’s political thought.
  • Woolhouse, R. 2009. Locke: A Biography. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • The best and most recent biography of Locke’s life.


Author Information

Patrick J. Connolly
Iowa State University
U. S. A.

Roy Wood Sellars (1880—1973)

from The Papers of Roy Wood Sellars; used by permission of the Bentley Historical Library at the University of MichiganRoy Wood Sellars was one of a generation of systematic philosophers in America the likes of which has not been seen before or since. He was born in Seaforth, Ontario in Canada, and spent most of his career at the University of Michigan where he continued working well into his 90s.  He was a fiercely independent thinker who resisted the fashions of the day in order to follow his own instincts.  He believed that the philosopher should be well-grounded both in the history of philosophy and in the sciences, and that the philosopher should engage philosophically with the major moral, social, and political issues of the day. His central aims were to combine and harmonize the insights of science and common sense, to update religion with the scientific advances of the day, and to promote a science-grounded system of progressive humanistic values. Over the course of his long life, Sellars wrote and published prolifically. He is the author of 15 books, over 100 articles, 14 book reviews and several miscellaneous works. He is best known for his pioneering formulations of critical realism (roughly, the view that, first, human beings normally perceive independent objects with their sensations but do not perceive sensations, and, second, human beings must interpret their sensations), evolutionary naturalism (a naturalistic version of emergent evolution), the “double knowledge” and mind-brain identity theory (the view that human beings possess two modes of knowledge of a single material reality), and a defence of religious humanism (the view that religion must be reinterpreted in terms of its role in improving humanity’s “this-worldly” existence).  He is the primary author of the Humanist Manifesto I of 1933.  Finally, he is the father of Wilfrid Sellars, a highly influential philosopher in his own right, many of whose views, allowing for the different vernacular and emphasis of the two periods, are continuous with his father’s views.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Critical Realism
  3. Evolutionary Naturalism
  4. Organicism
  5. Value Theory
  6. Socialism
  7. The Humanist Manifesto
  8. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Biography

Roy Wood Sellars (July 9, 1880-Sept. 5, 1973), was born in Seaforth, Ontario, the second son of Ford Wylis and Mary Stalker Sellars. (Warren 2007, 211 lists Sellars’ birth year as 1883, but this is an aberration. Most sources, including Warren elsewhere, all give the 1880 date. See Warren 1970, xi-xxv; 1973, 19-22; 1975, Ch. 1; Frankena 1973-74.) His ancestors had migrated from the Glasgow region in Scotland to Nova Scotia and later moved to Ontario.  In Ontario, the Sellars’ clan married into the prestigious Wood family, which included a distinguished Captain from the War of 1812 (David Wood) and the acting commissioner of the North West Mounted Police and Commissioner of the Canadian Yukon Territory (Zachary Taylor Wood).  This made him a relative to the 12th president of the United States (Zachary Taylor).  Sellars also took great pride in the fact that one of his ancestors, Lord Stanley, appears in Bosworth Field in Shakespeare’s Richard III.

Roy’s father, Ford, had been a schoolteacher and a school principal until health considerations forced him to abandon that profession.  Thereafter, Ford studied at the Medical School at the University of Michigan and became a physician in 1882. After graduating from medical school, the Sellars family settled in Pinnebog, Michigan. As this was a small town, Roy’s youthful companions were farm boys. In his youth, Roy pursued swimming, baseball, and hockey, and retained an interest in sports all his life.  His father’s library was the only one in the neighbourhood, and though young Roy knew little about philosophy, he read Emerson and Carlyle and had numerous discussions with his father about medicine. In this small rural community, Roy’s intellectual gifts quickly set him apart and he was sent to the Ferris Institute in Big Rapids, Michigan to prepare for a university career.

Roy entered the University of Michigan in 1899, where he did his own cooking and washed dishes for his lodgings.  Due to his small-town, rural background, the insecure young boy felt unprepared for a university program but he resolved to “make a go of it” and, upon his graduation, was voted one of the top two scholars in the class.  He studied widely in both the arts and the sciences, including rhetoric and calculus.  Sellars received his B.A. in 1903 from the University of Michigan and went on to Hartford Theological Seminary, where he studied New Testament Greek, Hebrew, and Arabic (and read the Koran in the original). He acquired a critical historically and culturally grounded approach to religion and a sympathy for social liberalism and humanism that remained with him throughout his life. In 1904 Professor R.M. Wenley of the Department of Philosophy at Michigan recommended Sellars for a fellowship at the University of Wisconsin, where he studied for a time before returning to the University of Michigan as Professor Wenley’s replacement while the latter was on sabbatical leave. Apart from a brief stint at University of Chicago in the summer of 1906 and a year studying in Europe (either 1908-09 or 1909-10 – sources differ on this), Sellars remained at the University of Michigan for the remainder of his approximately 40-year career, first as an instructor and doctoral student (he earned the Ph.D. in 1908 or 09 – again, sources differ), and then as a member of the permanent faculty.

During his year in Europe Sellars studied at the Sorbonne and discussed the possibility of a naturalistic formulation of emergent evolution with Henri Bergson. Bergson in turn referred him to the scientist and vitalist Hans Driesch. Sellars went on to study with Driesch and the neo-Kantian Wilhelm Windelband at Heidelberg. The precise details of Driesch’s influence on Sellars are not known but it seems likely that he directed Sellars to the study of physiology.  After returning to Michigan from his European adventures, Sellars developed a new course in the philosophy of science in which he used James Ward’s Naturalism and Agnosticism, as well as texts by Huxley, Mach, Poincaré, and Pearson.  Many of his students at this time came from the physical and biological sciences. Sellars remained scientifically-oriented throughout his life, a trait which he passed to his son Wilfrid. Even when Sellars was inspired by Bergson’s romantic or mystical theory of creative evolution, he sought (much like Popper) to recast it in more “naturalistic” terms acceptable to the sciences. Sellars’ naturalistic bent put him at odds with his most ardent supporter, Professor Wenley. Although Wenley regarded him as his best student, he could not accept Sellars’ naturalism, and did not approve of the publication of Sellars’ thesis by the University.

Sellars enjoyed considerable teaching success. His course, “The Principles and Problems of Philosophy,” was favorably remembered by many alumni who found it a “liberating” experience, “like taking a cold bath” (Frankena, 1973-74, 230).Several of the students in his political philosophy course, in which he discussed democracy, communism, socialism, and fascism, remarked that though they had expected him to be a propagandist, the course turned out to be a good scholarly treatment of the issues with no discernible bias.  Sellars had earlier taught a course in elementary logic and eventually published a textbook based on that course.  It was a chance reading of that textbook by Charles Stevenson that led him to the study of philosophy and later become one of Sellars’ colleagues (Frankena, 1973-74, 230).

Sellars married his cousin Helen Maud Stalker, an intelligent and accomplished woman, in 1911.  He wrote the Preface to Helen’s translation (from the French) of Celestine Bougle’s Evolution of Values.  Helen provided Sellars with much support and they remained close until her death in 1962.  In 1912 and 1913, respectively, their two children, Wilfrid and Cecily, were born. Cecily become a state-employed psychologist in North Dakota, but was killed in an automobile accident in 1954, an event which impacted Sellars’ scholarly work for decades. Twenty years later, well into his 90’s, he was still working on papers that had been in progress at the time of her death.  Wilfrid Sellars went on to become a highly influential philosopher in the latter half of the 20th century who, like his father, emphasized a firm grounding in the history of philosophy, fluency in the sciences, and a systematic approach to philosophical problems. It is noteworthy that his son Wilfrid developed a sophisticated version of scientific realism that builds on his father’s critical realism. In fact, Wilfrid’s views are often similar in substance to his father’s even if they differ in language and style.

Sellars believed in a fruitful, reciprocal relationship between epistemology and ontology, but saw epistemology as philosophically basic.  His most vehement criticism of other philosophers was often that they were weak in epistemology, but he also considered himself a proud ontologist.  Sellars also had a strong interest in ethics, social philosophy, and political philosophy.  Indeed, Sellars belongedto a genre of philosophers, which includes his son Wilfrid, that is rare today, who believed that a philosopher must be knowledgeable in virtually all areas of philosophy. Sellars made contributions to epistemology, metaphysics, ethics, the philosophy of science, social and political philosophy, and the history of philosophy. He could discourse in an intelligent and informed a way about Heidegger, Sartre, and Bergson just as he could about Russell, Carnap, or Einstein.  He was as at home in a discussion about ethics or social and political philosophy as he was in logic or scientific method.

Sellars was an independent thinker who resisted the fashions of the day in order to pursue his own philosophical direction.He formulated what may have been the most viable form of realism in his era. He offered a course, titled “Main Concepts of Science,” that may have been the very first course offered anywhere in the philosophy of science.  He formulated evolutionary naturalism, the view that life and mind are emergent products of naturalistically conceived evolution (i.e., without invoking the supernatural element in Alexander or Bergson’s élan vital). He (1923b; 1938a) pioneered the identity theory of the “brain-mind,” which he called the “double knowledge emergence approach” to mind-brain identity.  Although his basic views changed little over his career, he was constantly reformulating, developing, and clarifying them.  In his later years he watched as many of his views became commonplace, without being recognized for his role in their genesis.  

Perhaps because of his fierce independence, Sellars often found himself out of the mainstream. Until 1930, philosophy was dominated by idealism and pragmatism, religion by theism, and social theory by capitalism, while Sellars was a realist, an atheist, and a socialist. Later, analytical philosophy came into dominance and fundamentalism resurged in religion, neither of which appealed to him. Socialism did eventually enjoy a resurgence, but it was Marxist and totalitarian while Sellars was committed to a more moderate and gradual reform of social institutions based on rational persuasion.  Sellars was also critical of the American philosophy in his day. He (1970a, vii; see also Warren, 1975, 28) once remarked that, amongst philosophers, it is “almost always a Sellars against the world”. He often felt that he was better understood by psychologists and biologists than by philosophers and that he was better understood in Europe than in America (Warren 1975, 25).

Nonetheless, Sellars was a respected member of the philosophical community in America and it is safe to say that he inspired a personal affection from many of his colleagues that is unusual. He served as Vice-President of the Eastern Division of the APA in 1918 and President of the Western Division in 1923. He was an energetic correspondent and carried on friendly discussions with Samuel Alexander, C. Judson Herrick, Lloyd Morgan, and Marvin Farber. He also corresponded with F.H. Bradley, Bernard Bosanquet, C.A. Strong, and Donald Williams, and he debated with D.C. Macintosh, H.N. Wieman, and Sydney Hook.  In 1954 the journal Philosophy and Phenomenological Research devoted an entire issue to Sellars’ philosophy, and in 1964 Andrew Reck listed Sellars as one of the 10 most notable philosophers in recent American philosophy. At the University of Michigan the Roy Wood Sellars Chair was created in his honor and Bucknell University honored him by establishing the Roy Wood Sellars Lecture Series. The first Roy Wood Sellars Lectures were given by Warren and the second by Wilfrid Sellars with Roy Sellars in attendance. In 1970 Notre Dame University honored Roy in his 90th year with a symposium on his philosophy, including presentations by Andrew Reck, Wilfrid Sellars, and C.F. Delany.  Although Roybelonged to a generation of America’s greatest systematic philosophers, Frankena (1973-4, 231) observes that, with hindsight, Sellars may have been one of the most important of them.  However, the fact that his son Wilfrid has developed a powerful formulation of his father’s views may be the greatest testament to Roy Wood Sellars’ lasting achievement.

2. Critical Realism

Much of Sellars’ philosophical work is an attempt to replace outdated mythopoetical views about knowledge, religion, values, and so forth, by up-to-date scientifically grounded views.  Science, he holds, “builds” on common sense, but since it develops new concepts based on new instruments and the application of mathematics to experience, the philosopher’s job is to harmonize the common sense and scientific frameworks (1932a, v; 1973, 160-161).

In his first book, Critical Realism , he attempts to justify common sense realism, which is also the view of philosophers when they are not in a reflective mood (1916a, 6)—the view that people perceive real external objects, not just intermediaries of some kind. He also aims to clarify the relation of common sense realism to scientific knowledge: “We start from independent things; and not from percepts” (1916a, 3).  Sellars also argues against the main theories of perception of his day: idealism, representationalism, pragmatism, and positivism, all of which he saw as undermining common sense realism. Other versions of critical realism were espoused by Santanaya and Lovejoy.

The defence of common sense realism, he (1941b; 1959c) holds, requires a robust defence of the correspondence theory of truth.The basic error in those mistaken views of perception is the failure to distinguish between the content and object of perception (1922a, 70 n 4).  Since the content of perception is fixed by aspects of the organism, those mistaken theories wrongly infer that the object of perception is not independent of the perceiver.

Sellars’ critical realism requires real substances (as opposed to ideas, universals, impressions, and so forth) as objects of perception. He (1929c; 1970a, 32; 1973, 182, 346-348, 353) rejects “the historical desiccation of the category of substance,” that is, the whittling down of the Ancient and Medieval robust notion of substance to Locke’s “I know not what”. While representationalism, idealism, pragmatism, and positivism tend to volatize the object of perception into ideas, sensations, or a mere placeholder for properties, Sellars holds the normal objects of perception are real full-bodied independent substances.

Although Sellars’ critical (or “referential”) realism is “built up from” common-sense realism, it is not identical with common sense since the latter has not faced the problems arising from discrepancies in perception (See his 1922c; 1924b; 1927b; 1927c; 1937a; 1938b; 1939b; 1959b; 1961a; 1962; 1963; 1970, 6-8, 13, 15-16, 17-27, 33-35, 161; see also Warren, 1975, 35, 37). Despite his defense of common sense realism,Sellars rejects the “naïve realism” that identifies the immediate datum of knowledge with objects in the world. He distinguishes between the common sense realism of the ordinary person and the crude philosophical understanding embodied in naïve realism, the view that in perception one actually “intuits” the object (1963; see also Warren, 1975, 36-7).  In opposition to that naïve view, he holds that in perception one interprets one’s sensations. The interpretation of sensations is not a purely intellectual process: “A gull does not in the Lockean way apprehend his sensation …. [It] looks through his sensation at the fish in the water. It is a one-step sensi-motor process” (See his 1970a, 118; 1973, 49-50, 161; 1975; and Warren, 1975, 38-45!).

Sellars holds that the biological basis of knowledge consists in the organism’s adjustment to its external environment, where both the internal adjustment of the organism and external factors must be taken into account.  He sees his version of critical realism as a “mediate realism” that attempts to do justice both to the contribution of the perceiving organism and the claims of objective knowledge. That is, he aims to do justice to both the real and the “ideal” sides of cognition. It is absolutely crucial, he (1922a, 76-77) stresses, to distinguish between the causal conditions of perception and the referential act of perceiving. Perception is the interpretation of sense mediated by factors both internal and external to the perceiving subject. These internal factors are not to be confused with the mechanism or processes that underlie perception (that is, the account of the internal mechanism or processes is not an account of the content of perception). By taking account of both the internal and external factors, he seeks to avoid the evils of both naïve realism and the non-realist view that the objects of perception are not independent of mind.

The attempt of simultaneous justice to both  the subjective contribution of the organism and  the claims of objective knowledge is no easy matter. Various critical realists could not always agree how best to formulate the view (See Ramsperger, 1967). For example, Sellars (1970a, 5) rejects the sort of critical realism espoused by Santayana that erects a barrier of essences between the perceiver and the external object. Perhaps his basic point is that human beings perceive independent objects with their sensations, but do not perceive sensations, essences, or other mental or ideal intermediaries themselves (Warren, 1975, 38, 42). Sellars (1970a, 114-5) stresses that the fact that the object is present to consciousness does not mean that it must be present within consciousness.

Although Sellars’ sometimes wrote as if his version of critical realism is definitive,few agree that it is unproblematic. Since he acknowledges the subjective contribution of the perceiver, it can resemble representationalism. Since, however, he emphasizes that perception is a direct perception of independent objects, it can resembles naïve realism. Sellars counters that critical realism is the view that human knowing is a direct knowledge of objects, but that this knowledge is mediated by “logical ideas” (See his 1970a, 113 and the “Epilogue on Berkeley” in his 1968).  The problem is that it is hard to see how knowledge can be both mediated and direct. The claim that one perceives independent objects via one’s sensations but does not perceive those sensations themselves is a fair negative point, but seems to require a more robust positive account of the precise role of sensations in the perception of external objects. Sellars’ version of critical realism is intriguing, but many feel it requires further clarification (Chisholm 1955; Herbert, 1994; Wright, 1994; Levine, 2007).  Perhaps this is why Sellars continued to return to the issue again and again over the decades (See his 1929a; 1929b; 1929c; 1937a; 1938b; 1939b; 1950a; 1961a; 1962; 1963; 1965; 1969d, Ch’s 4-5; 1970a, 112-131; and so forth).

3. Evolutionary Naturalism

Sellars does not have a fully developed philosophy of science, this being more characteristic of his son’s generation, but he does have definite views about scientific method and about the close relation of science to philosophy, some of which do anticipate his son’s views.  Sellars’ conception of science and its relation to philosophy is intimately related to his own views of evolutionary naturalism.

In Sellars’ (1973, 160-1) view, science “builds” on common sense, but it develops new concepts based on new instruments and the application of mathematics to experience, and so forth. He rejects the monochrome Newtonian universe in favor of an evolution-generated hierarchy of different levels of emergent causality: Under certain favorable conditions, life emerges from matter and mind from life (See his 1920c; 1922a, Ch. IX; 1924a; 1927a; 1933a; 1944b; 1959a; 1932, 4; 1969d, 64-68; and 1973, 290).  He is committed to the emergence of downward causal forces. That is, while the emergence of higher-order entities is causally dependent upon lower-order entities (bottom-up causation), once they emerge, the former may causally influence the latter (top-down causation) in ways not reducible to bottom-up causation (see Roy’s 1970, 38, 44-46 and Meehl and Sellars 1956). Sellars insists that the higher emergent entities are still material systems.

Although he does not deny the possibility of reductions in special cases, his conception of science is generally anti-reductionist (1922a, 16, 332; 1970, 136, 141, 240-1; Warren, 1975, 29).This explains why he holds that the scientific method cannot be identified with that of any particular science, such as physics (Warren, 1975, 29). When he (1932a, 5) describes his own view as physicalism, he does not mean physicalism in the more familiar sense but a view that accepts his own critical realism and emergence. Each of the sciences; natural, psychological, and social, treats of a particular domain in the emergent hierarchy, but none is privileged over the others.

The commitment to real independent substances in his critical realism dovetails with his evolutionary naturalism. The different levels in the emergent hierarchy are not just of events or properties, but of substances (1922a, Ch. XIII; 1932a, Ch. XII; 1943c; 1959a; 1970, 215).  Though the higher emergent levels are not reducible to material mechanisms, they do not introduce new non-natural forces. Life and mind are not non-natural forces entering nature from outside, but emergent capacities of natural substances (See his 1917b, 276-283; 1922a, vii-ix, 277-278, 333-336; 1933a; 1950b). See Emmet (1932, 222-23) for Whitehead’s very different Platonistic view)!

Sellars tends not to employ the classical formulation of emergence, that certain wholes are “greater than the sum of their parts”.  He (1922a, 302) does, however, use such formulations occasionally. See also his remarks on the relations of wholes and parts (1917a, 31, 145, 288). Since he talks of new unitary substantial wholes, talk of separable “parts” may be seen as misleading.Wilfrid Sellars (1949) clarifies his father’s somewhat obscure views. In general, however, in language reminiscent of Bergson but understood naturalistically, Sellars (1922a, viii, 17, 139, 167, 214-215, 297, 303, 322, 335, and so forth; 1932a, 3, 401; Blitz 2010) holds that modern science is beginning to accept the notion of “creative synthesis”, the view that change sometimes involves “the genesis of what Locke called ‘real essences’”.For a discussion of the classical part-whole formulations of emergence see McDonough (2002).

Agential causality, which is central to Sellars’ ethics, is underwritten by his evolutionary naturalism (1970a, 262-267). Agential causality emerges at a certain level of evolution and organization (1970a, viii; 1973a, Ch. 15). Human beings possess no “pushbutton free will,” but rather, an emergent capacity of the human brain is able to develop new judgments and standards that make a causal difference in behaviour (1932a, 396, 405; 1957a; 1959a; 1970a, 305; 1973a, 290-1, 361-384). He called his view “critical anthropomorphism” (1917b, 278).

Sellars’ evolutionary naturalism colors his view of the relation between science and philosophy. The diversity of the various irreducible levels in the emergent hierarchy requires a diversity of distinct autonomous sciences: physics, chemistry, biology, and so forth.  This yields problems with which none of the special sciences are prepared to deal.  The physicist can describe the behaviour of subatomic particles, but, qua physicist, is unfamiliar with the regularities and properties at higher levels in the emergent hierarchy. Similar points, in reverse, can be made about the biologist (psychologist, sociologist, and so forth), who are familiar with the objects at their higher levels of the hierarchy, but qua biologist, psychologist, sociologist, and so forth, are unfamiliar with the laws and properties at the lower levels.  Since, however, the evolutionary naturalist holds that the different levels in the emergent hierarchy constitute autonomous regions that fall outside any of the particular sciences, and since the items at different levels of the emergent hierarchy are linked in interesting ways that cannot be captured by reductions of one level to another, knowledge of the interrelations between these levels requires a different sort of knowledge, not possessed by any of the special sciences.

It is the distinctive job of the philosopher to obtain an overview of the relations between the different sciences, and between the sciences and the common sense framework, harmonize the new levels in the emergent hierarchy with each other and with the more stable and fixed background of inorganic nature (1922a, 263, 329; 1932a, 44ff, 79ff, 92ff).  Thus, philosophy completes science. “The job of philosophy is to size up the whole situation; and it often needs new leads” (1973, 161).One can see here the general outlines of his son’s (1991, 2, 18-19, 34, and so forth) view, that the distinctive job of philosophy is to obtain a synoptic view of the way things hang together, in the broadest sense.

Sellars published Evolutionary Naturalism in 1922, a year before both Morgan’s Emergent Evolution and Alexander’s “Natural Piety” (Warren, 1970, vi), although the latter two came to be better known for the formulation of emergent evolution. Warren (1973b) remarks that Morgan told Sellars that to his knowledge, Sellars was the first to publish on emergent evolution.  Bergson’s Creative Evolution, first published in 1907, does precede Sellars’ publications, but it differs in that it posits the non-scientific élan vital. Sellars saw his position as more systematic, empirical, and naturalistic than Bergson’s and Morgan’s since it does not introduce any non-natural controlling factors. Although Sellars’ evolutionary naturalism fell out of favor as reductionism gained ground, emergentism has once again arisen as a viable position in science, philosophy and religion (Beckermann, Kim, and Flores 1992; Hasker 2001; McDonough 2002; Davies and Clayton 2008, Blitz 2010; Vintiadis, and so forth).

4. Organicism

Although Sellars (1991, 415, 433) states that no other writer in recent times had challenged him as much, he claims that his own view deserves the title “philosophy of organism” more than Whitehead’s.  This is because Sellars sees living organisms as substantial wholes, whereas Whitehead sees them as a societies or nexuses of more fundamental entities. Sellars (1922a, vii-ix, 164-168) sees an organism as a product of emergent evolution in which simpler materials at a lower level are organized into new integrated substances with new causal powers at higher levels in the hierarchy. This higher-order substance is a true unity and not, as for Whitehead, a plurality (see Roy’s 1961b).

The living organism is, for Sellars, the background against which consciousness must be understood (1922a, 63, 298; 1932a, 446-7; 1949b, 95, 99). This leads him (1991, 415; 1970, 205) to agree with contemporaneous developments in physics, chemistry, biology, and psychology that emphasize fields and Gestalten, both of which are wholes that are not reducible to more fundamental entities.  Even so, the focus on the important organismic background should not lead one to confuse knowledge of the object with knowledge about the organism (1922a, 186-187). For similar reasons, he does not see a person as a combination of two separable substances as in Cartesian Dualism. He (1991, 415) describes his own position, which rejects the vitalistic and non-evolutionary elements in classical Aristotelianism, as an “Aristotelianism of the Left”. The same considerations lead him (1932a, 14-15; 1961b; 1973, 354-56; 1991, 416-7) to oppose the “reformed subjectivism” which he saw as the source both of the Platonism and rejection of naturalism and humanism in Whitehead’s philosophy of organism.

5. Value Theory

Sellars’ evolutionary naturalism make values “centripetal” to human life and supports a humanistic theory of ethics and religion (1932a, 448; 1948b; 1949b, 78; 973, Ch. 14), all of which he counts as a virtue  He holds that human freedom emerges at a certain level or organization of organic development and lends a dignity and meaning to human life that is absent in a purely mechanical cosmos (1957a; 1949b, 103-4; 1970, 319-331).  Whereas the “old materialism” had been criticized as being unable to accommodate higher values, Sellars sees it as a virtue of his “new materialism” that it “flowers into humanism” (See also his 1932a, 19; 1944b; 1950b, 427-428). The emergence of living organisms from inorganic nature is a necessary condition for the existence of a world of values (1932a, 446-7).  It is people and human institutions that form the “hot center” of conscious life, while the inorganic world forms the “periphery and yet absolute condition for the whole drama” (1932a, 450).

Sellars is generally averse to ontological dualisms (1916a, 204, 245; 1922, 3091973a, Ch. 14; see also Sellars, McGill, and Farber, 1949) and holds they have done particular damage in value theory (see Roy’s 1917b, Ch. XVI; 1918, Ch. XII and Ch. XVI; 1921a; 1950b; Warren, 1975, 27, 41-2).  In general, he holds that each side in value-dualisms captures some fragment of the truth, but in their pure forms such dualisms are incapable of yielding a coherent theory of value.  Whereas some theories emphasize the objective basis, and others the subjective basis, for values, Sellars’ aims to do justice both “to the possibilities in the object and in the subject,” while taking “as objective a view of value as possible” (1932a, 445, 475; 1969d, Ch. 12). He sees this as an area where compromise and balance are essential. Value judgments are similar to cognitive judgments in some ways, but different in others. One can make mistakes in value judgments just as in cognitive judgments, but physical science does not discover values as properties of objects (1932a, 445; 1973, 344).  Rather, values are an interpretation of objects as having the capacity to affect human life in ways important to an individual or group (1932a, 445, 459-473; Warren 1975, 40).

In cognitive judgments, human beings regard themselves as disclosing the object itself, while in value judgments human beings are estimating the object with respect to its bearing on human life (1932a, 46).When the subjectivist claims that values are based on feelings, Sellars agrees, but holds that these subjective feelings are directed towards facts that can be objectively criticized. When the objectivist claims that values are based on objective facts, Sellars agrees, but holds that these facts only have value when “estimated with respect to human living” (1932a, 444). In valuing we are constrained by objective factors just as in perceiving, but we are also “interpreting” the object in the light of factors which are taken to be intimately linked to the self (1932a, 471; 1970, 244, 253, and so forth). It is important to acknowledge that Sellars (1922a, 29-30, 194-5, 312; and see and Wood, 1950, 525) does see the need for a kind of dualism in epistemology.

Sellars subjects “absolutism” and “factualism” about values to similar criticisms.  He (1932a, 457-459) rejects belief in absolute or intrinsic values since “a good which is not good for someone strikes me as meaningless”.  He (1932a, 16ff) describes “Eleatic views” that deny the significance of everyday beliefs as versions of “illusionism”. Similarly, when the “factualist” attempts to reduce values to some fact about human beings or human groups, for example, the fact that human beings prefer certain things and not others, Sellars (1932a, 452-3; 1970a, 245) replies that people are not like stones with only one possible reaction.  That is, alluding to his critique of “naïve realism”, these various “facts” are always really only some naïve immediate value (1932a,452). Even if some authority, for example, a church or an anthropologist, holds X is good, it is always possible to criticize that naïve immediate valuation by estimating its effect on human life. No authority, neither religious nor “scientific”, is immune to criticism.

Sellars (1932a, 446-7) stresses that “the background” to judgments of value is the emergent level of living organisms presupposed by the existence of value.Since an organism emerges from inorganic nature in the evolutionary process, his evolutionary naturalism is an essential part of his account of the genesis of the complex subject-object situations required for the existence of value (1922a, Ch. XV; 1932a, 68, 442; 1970a, 248-9, 267). Referring to his “open ended” emergent evolutionism (1970a, 267), he states that his “metaphysics of ethics in many ways represents its culmination” and that any attempt to explain the existence of value by reference to mere lifeless nature cannot succeed (1973, 359-60).

Sellars’ evolutionary naturalism is not just another version of materialism, but is enriched by his belief in the evolution of an emergent hierarchy containing the higher levels organisms and persons (1950b, 420, 422-6; 1970a, 154-173).  His naturalism “does not,” as some older versions of materialism, focused only on the physical sciences, did, “ignore the specialized areas of human living, morals, art, politics” (1932a, 449). Because man is “not just a knower but an agent” and a “desirer of good things”, the philosopher, in order to avoid an overly narrow conception of the human situation, must turn to the poets for a sense of “creative agency and decision” (1932a, 449).

6. Socialism

In The Next Step in Democracy (1916b) Sellars defends his own version of socialism (See also his 1970a, 272-73, 277-79, 289, 311, 334). Sellars distinguishes three stages of socialism: (1) the Utopian socialism of Fourier and Saint-Simon, (2) the “political socialism” that began with Marx’s Communist Manifesto, and (3) the later modification of Marx’s socialism based on an updated understanding of how society and people really work (1944-45b; 1970a, 272). The political socialism of Marx is called “scientific socialism” by its admirers, “orthodox socialism” by its critics (1970a, 279ff).

Sellars also rejects Utopian socialism as naïve and romantic, having little understanding of the obstacles to the creation of a genuine socialist society (1970a, 81). In contrast to the Utopian socialists, Sellars promotes a gradual modification of existing institutions in the light of new scientific advances with a full awareness that any “reckless unsettling” of the social foundations leads to disaster (1970a, 280, 292-293).  Sellars rejected the program to overthrow tradition on the basis of naïve romantic dreams of wishful thinking.

Although Sellars (1970a, 28-287) sees Marx as a fairly realistic and concrete “sort”, he holds that Marx was misled by revolutionary ardour into seeing history as a constant war of class struggle. Sellars, by contrast, sees the Marxian stage of socialism, not so much scientific as realistic, but he thinks Marxist realism (the recognition that the old order will not easily give way to rational persuasion) led to the introduction of a dangerous militancy into socialism. Further, whereas many saw Marx’s determinism as a strength, Sellars takes Marx’s view that capitalist society contains the seeds of its own destruction as empirically falsified (1970a, 308). Further, Marx underestimated the ability of capitalism to make adjustments (1970a, 284, 286, 307-8; 1944-45b).  Sellars (1970a, 287, 303-304) replaces Marx’s “semi-mechanical and almost wholly deterministic” outlook by the view that the people must learn to emancipate themselves by participation in the political process. Participation in the democratic process requires the development of the necessary virtues: cooperation and ingenuity, the application of continuous experiments to find out what works best, the determination and patience to approach the ultimate goal by slow degrees (1970a, 287).  Whereas Marx seems to absolve the individual of responsibility for the eventual outcome by representing the march towards the goal as the inevitable result of the great supra-individual forces of history, Sellars (1971a, 333-334) emphasizes the essential educative role of the individuals participation in the process that renders the individual prepared for and worthy of the final goal. Although Sellars was sometimes seen as a radical in his day (1970a, 272), he defines socialism as a democratic movement whose aim is to secure the greatest justice and liberty for the maximum number of people at any given time, without the wholesale overturning of tradition by violent methods (1943d).  In opposition to the militant socialism of old, he presents a moderate democratic recipe for achieving socialist goals via “rational reform” while escaping the “vicious dialectic of hate and counter-hate” (1970a, 291, 304). Progress cannot be achieved by one side imposing its view on the whole but by the “interplay” of conservatives on the one side and liberals on the other that the direction and speed of social progress is determined” (1916b, 3; 1970a, 307-308).

7. The Humanist Manifesto

Early in his studies, Sellars considered a career in comparative religion, but with his usual idiosyncratic twist, he wished to do so from a scientific, humanistic, and atheistic point of view. In Evolutionary Naturalism, he describes the religious impulse as “one of the most admirable … in human nature” (1922, 5; see also his 1918, 26 and his 1969a, Ch. 11), but he also holds that religion must be “brought to the world disclosed through science” (1918, 44-45, 222; see also Warren 1975, 24-25).  Given his naturalism, the appeal to supernatural entities and explanations must be eliminated and replaced by an emphasis on human flourishing as citizens of a shared world (Wilson, 1995, Ch. 17).  Whereas religions traditionally conceived salvation as something that comes to man from the outside, Sellars (1918, 12) sees it as something that must arise out of the “loyal union” of human beings who share a belief in the values of life. Traditional religions also often see creation as completed, meaning that a person’s job is merely to understand the pattern in order to follow it, Sellars (1947), reflecting Bergson’s influence, holds that people must learn to recognize creation as “a going concern,” in which their contribution to the further emergence of the universe is essential.

In 1932, Sellars was approached by Raymond Bragg on behalf of a Chicago-based group of humanists associated with The New Humanist (for which Bragg was an associate editor). The group had for some time been contemplating the need for an official statement of the religious humanist position, but recognizing the difficulties inherent in group authorship, chose to have a complete first draft written by a single author. After hearing him lecture in Chicago, Bragg approached Sellars about the project and Sellars accepted with the unanimous support of the Chicago group.  The document published in the following year, the Humanist Manifesto of 1933 (or Humanist Manifesto I), is the result of numerous revisions by multiple contributors upon Sellars’ original draft. While that draft has been lost to history, the fact that Sellars signed the 1933 document, and later-on claimed primary authorship of it, suggests that whatever changes were made did not, in his mind, affect the substance of what he had written. For these reasons it has Sellars as the pre-eminent author of the Manifesto, although that is not to minimize the contributions of others.

In the Manifesto, Sellars attempts to put the essence of his religious humanism into a form suitable not just for fellow professors, but for the general public. It is important to remember that along with many of the original signers of the Humanist Manifesto I, Sellars conceived of humanism not as a replacement for religion but as a new religion (1918, Ch. XVI; 1969d, Ch. 11; Wilson 1995, Ch. 17).  Nevertheless, his naturalized religion shades inevitably into a this-worldly humanist philosophy that, he (1932a, 7) holds, attempts to blend “those two great naturalists, Spinoza and Nietzsche, uniting the passion for life of the one with the cosmic calm of the other.”

Humanist Manifesto I was conceived as the statement of a new secular religion designed to replace the old religions that had been founded on claims of supernatural revelation, or on fear and helplessness (1918c, Foreword).  It opposes an acquisitive and profit-motivated society, and outlines a mutually cooperative worldwide society committed to the rational resolution of problems. Thirty-four of sixty-five persons asked to sign did, including Edwin Burtt of Cornell, and John Dewey and John Hermann Randall of Columbia. About one-third of the signatories were professors from the University of Chicago and from Columbia University; about half were Unitarians (Wilson 1995, Ch. 10).

The Manifesto contains fifteen theses (briefly summarized here):

  1. The universe is self-existing, not created.
  2. Man is a part of nature that has emerged in a continuous process.
  3. Since humanists hold an organic view of life, they reject the traditional mind-body dualism.
  4. Man’s religious culture is a result of gradual natural development as a result of  man’s interaction with the natural environment and social heritage.
  5. Science has shown that supernatural and cosmic guarantors of human values are unsupported, so religion must re-formulate its views in the light of scientific knowledge.
  6. Theism, modernism, and other varieties of “new thought” have been surpassed.
  7. The distinction between the secular and the religious cannot be defended any longer: Nothing that is human is alien to religion.
  8. The purpose of man’s life is the complete realization of the possibilities in human personality.
  9. Humanists find their religious feelings expressed in an intensified sense of their personal lives and the cooperative effort to produce social well-being.
  10. There are no uniquely religious emotions connected with the supernatural.
  11. Man must discourage sentimental hopes and wishful thinking and face the challenges of life by embracing rational procedures.
  12. Religious humanists aim to enhance the creative element in man in order to add to produce a more meaningful life.
  13. All social associations should exist for the promotion of human flourishing.
  14. A socialized cooperative economic system must be established for the fair distribution of the necessities of life to all human beings.
  15. Religious humanists seek to affirm human life rather than deny it, seek to discover the full possibilities of life, not run from them, and aim to establish the conditions of a just and meaningful life for all, not just the privileged few.

For a complete statement of the theses, see Sellars (1970a, 331-335).

Some humanists declined to sign Manifesto I. Dr. Arthur Morgan stated several differences of emphasis, but also some more substantial objections (Wilson 1995, Ch. 7). Anticipating recent views in “deep ecology” (See Sessions, 1995), Morgan felt that Manifesto I placed too much emphasis on human life and failed to recognize that there may be significance in other life-forms. Morgan called for a “race of businessmen” which sees business as a public trust, not a means to personal enrichment, and he objected to the “unjustified cocksureness” of Manifesto I, feeling that it is “not dictated by humility or imagination”. Morgan also felt that though religion should be disciplined by science, it should not be limited by it.  His most biting criticism was that many humanists are “not strong in faith, hope, and love.”

John Haynes Holmes, the prominent Unitarian minister and noted pacifist, declined to sign Manifesto I since he objected to the rejection of theism in the 6th thesis, holding instead that a rational humanism “inevitably unfolds into a rational theism” (Wilson 1995,Ch. 7). He also found terms like “modernism,” in the 6th thesis “hopelessly vague” and wondered why a humanist could not claim to represent the best of modernism. Although he found the deism of some of the authors “not half bad,” he insists that “Theism … is the blossom that grows on the plant of humanism, the poetry into which it unfolds in mystic beauty”.

Howard Shapley, a Harvard astronomer, spoke for many scientists who were reluctant to make judgments about religion: “As a social philosopher I am embryonic and I have decided that I should not misuse my position by pretending to intelligence or comprehension in a field in which my thoughts have been too scattered and probably too prejudiced” (Wilson 1995, Ch. 7). Although Shapley agrees with current traditions of protecting the weak, he is not sure that this is in keeping with “the biological traditions of the planet”. His point is not that the weak should not be protected, but that, as a scientist, he cannot claim to know this, and, therefore, he should not put his authority as a scientist behind the claim.

In his retrospective on Humanist Manifesto I, Wilson remarks that he now feels it to be a mistake to tie humanism directly to socialism. Humanism should not be tied to any particular economic system, but should concern itself with the more general goals of ending disease, poverty, ignorance, prejudice, and so forth (Wilson 1995, Ch. 18).

Later versions of the Manifesto found their own objections.  Humanist Manifesto II found the language in Manifesto I to be “far too optimistic” about the possibility of eliminating social evils. Frances Schaeffer (2005) authored A Christian Manifesto (in opposition to the Communist Manifesto) which holds that both the humanist and communist Manifestos, despite significant differences between them, tend to foster similar forms of social degeneration. Schaeffer sees humanism as the unfortunate view that man is the measure of all things, and holds that even if that is not the humanist’s intention Manifesto I undermines the ideals of objective truth and morality. One major difference between Manifesto I and later humanist Manifestos and statements is that Manifesto I arose out of religious humanism (1918, Ch. XVI), and was, accordingly, much more sympathetic to religion per se than these later documents.

The objections by various humanists, both earlier and later, to signing Humanist Manifesto I show just how difficult it is to obtain agreement on such a central issue from such a diverse group of intellectuals representing different fields and backgrounds. Nevertheless, despite the various objections and reservations to Manifesto I, and the various replacement manifestos and declarations that appeared in later years, Manifesto I remains a significant historical document in the genesis of the humanist movement, and one that Sellars, who, it is probably fair to say, is “the principal author” of the published version, played an fundamental role in creating.

8. References and Further Reading

Several of Roy Wood Sellars’ works can be obtained in electronic form at The Internet ArchiveThe Autodidact Project and the online library of The Secular Web. Additional information on the various versions of the Humanist Manifestos and The Amsterdam Declaration is available online from the International Humanist and Ethical Union, the American Humanist Association, and the Council for Secular Humanism.

a. Primary Sources

  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1902. "Re-interpretation of Democracy.” Inlander (University of Michigan publication), 12: 252-61.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1907a. "The Nature of Experience." Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods: 14-18.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1907b. "A Fourth Progression in the Relation of Body and Mind." Psychological Review 14: 315-28.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1907c. "Professor Dewey's View of Agreement." Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 4 (16): 315-28.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1908a. "An Important Antinomy." Psychological Review 15 (4): 237-249.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1908b. "Consciousness and Conservation." Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 5 (9): 235-38.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1908c. "Critical Realism and the Time Problem I." Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 5 (20): 542-48.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1908d. "Critical Realism and the Time Problem II." Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 5 (27): 597-602. 
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1909a. "Causality." Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 6: 323-28.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1909b. "Space." Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods. 6: 617-23.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1912. "Is There a Cognitive Relation?" Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 9 (9): 225-328.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1915. "A Thing and its Properties." Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 12 (12): 318-28.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1916a. Critical Realism: A Study of the Nature and Conditions of Knowledge. Chicago: Rand-McNally and Co.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1916b. The Next Step in Democracy. New York: Macmillan.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1917a. The Essentials of Logic. Boston: Houghton Mifflin Co.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1917b. The Essentials of Philosophy. New York: Macmillan.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1918a. "An Approach to the Mind-Body Problem." Philosophical Review 27 (2): 150-63.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1918b. "On the Nature of Our Knowledge of the External World." Philosophical Review 27 (5): 502-12.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1918c. The Next Step in Religion. New York: Macmillan.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1918d. “Review of P. Coffey, Epistemology, Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 15: 557-8.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1919a. "The Epistemology of Evolutionary Naturalism." Mind 28 (112): 407-26.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1919b. “Review of George Wobbermin, Christian Belief in God.” Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 16: 277-9.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1920a. "The Status of Categories." The Monist 30 (2): 220-39.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1920b. "Space and Time." The Monist 30 (3): 321-64.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1920c. "Evolutionary Naturalism and the Mind-Body Problem." The Monist 30 (4): 568-98.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1920d. "Knowledge and Its Categories." Essays in Critical Realism, R.W. Sellars, Durant Drake, A.O. Lovejoy, James Pratt, Arthur Rogers, George Santayana, (ed’s). New York: Macmillan: 187-219.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1920e. “Review of J. A. Leighton, The Field of Philosophy.” Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 17: 79-81.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1920f. "Preface." to Evolution of Values, Helen Maud Sellars, (trans.). New York: Henry Holt.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1921a. "Epistemological Dualism versus Metaphysical Dualism." Philosophical Review 30 (5): 482-93.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1921b. "The Requirement of an Adequate Naturalism." The Monist 31 (2): 249-70.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1922a. Evolutionary Naturalism. Chicago: Open Court.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1922b. "Is Consciousness Physical?" Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 19 (25): 690-94.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1922c. "Concerning 'Transcendence' and 'Bifurcation'" Mind 31 (121): 31-39.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1923a. "Le Cerveau, L'âme et La Conscience." Bulletin de la Société Francais de Philosophie: 1-14.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. January, 1923b (some sources say 1922). "The Double Knowledge Approach to the Mind-Body Problem." Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, N.S. 23: 55-70 (reprinted in Principles of Emergent Realism: 188-201).
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1924a. "The Emergence of Naturalism." International Journal of Ethics 34 (4): 309-38.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1924b. "Critical Realism and Its Critics." Philosophical Review 33 (4): 379-97.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1926a. The Principles and Problems of Philosophy. New York: Macmillan.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1926b. "Cognition and Valuation," Philosophical Review 35 (2): 124-44.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1927a. "Realism and Evolutionary Naturalism: A Reply to Professor Hoernlé." The Monist. 37 (1): 150-55.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1927b. "Current Realism in Great Britain and the United States." The Monist 37 (4): 503-520.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1927c. "What is the Correct Interpretation of Critical Realism?," Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 24 (9): 238-241.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1927d. "Why Naturalism and Not Materialism?," Philosophical Review 36 (3): 215-25.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1928a. Religion Coming of Age. New York: Macmillan.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1928b. "Current Realism in Great Britain and the United States." Philosophy Today Edward L. Schaub, (ed.). Chicago and London (reprint from The Monist, 1927): 19-36.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1929a. "Current Realism." Anthology of Recent Philosophy D. S. Robinson, (ed.). New York: Thomas Y. Crowell Co. (re-print from Philosophy Today): 279-290.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1929b. "A Re-examination of Critical Realism." Philosophical Review 38 (5): 439-55.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1929c. "Critical Realism and Substance." Mind 38 (152): 473-88. Reprinted in Ruth Goff, (ed.). 2008. Revitalizing Causality: Realism About Causality in Philosophy and Social Science. New York: Routledge: 13-25.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1930a. "A Naturalistic Interpretation of Religion." The New Humanist 3 (4): 1-4.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1930b. "Realism, Naturalism and Humanism." in Contemporary American Philosophy G. P. Adams and W. P. Montague, v. 2. (eds.), New York: Macmillan: 261-85.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1931. "Humanism, Viewed and Reviewed." The New Humanist 4 (15): 12-16.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1932a. The Philosophy of Physical Realism. New York: Macmillan.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1932b. "Reinterpretation of Relativity." Philosophical Review 41 (5): 517-18.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1933a. "L'Hypothèse de l'Émergence." Revue de Métaphysique et de Morale 40 (3): 309-24.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1933b. "Religious Humanism." The New Humanist 6 (3): 7-12.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood (Drafter and co-signer). May-June, 1933c. "Humanist Manifesto." The New Humanist 6 (3): 58-61.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1933d. "In Defense of the Manifesto." The New Humanist 6 (6): 6-12.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1933e. “Review of Durant Drake, Introduction to Philosophy.” Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 3: 667-9.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1934. "Nature and Naturalism." The New Humanist 7 (2): 1-8.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1935a. “Review of C. F. Gauss, Primer for Tomorrow.” Michigan Alumnus Quarterly Review. 41: 465-6.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1935b. "George S. Morris." Dictionary of American Biography 13: 208-9.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1937a. "Critical Realism and the Independence of the Object." Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 34 (20): 541-550.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1937b. "Henry Philip Tappan." Dictionary of American Biography 18: 302-3.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1938a. "An Analytic Approach to the Mind-Body Problem." Philosophical Review 47 (5): 461-87.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1938b. "A Statement of Critical Realism." Revue Internationale de Philosophie 3: 472-496.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1939a. "Positivism in Contemporary Philosophical Thought." American Sociological Review: 26-42.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1939b. "A Clarification of Critical Realism." Philosophy of Science 6 (4): 412-92.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1940. "Knowledge and its Categories." The Development of American Philosophy, W. G. Muelder and Laurence Sears, (ed’s). Cambridge, Mass: 431-40  (Reprinted from Drake, Durant. 1920. Essays in Critical Realism. New York: Gordian Press: 187-219)
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1941a. "Humanism as a Religion." The Humanist 1 (1): 5-8.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1941b. "A Correspondence Theory of Truth." Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 38 (24): 653-54.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1942a. "Aspects of Democracy II: the Quality of Democracy." Michigan Alumnus Quarterly Review 48: 98-103.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1942b. "Galileo Galilei." Michigan Alumnus Quarterly Review 48: 301-7.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1942c. “Review of E. Gilson, God and Philosophy.” The Humanist 2: 36-7.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1942-43. "Dewey on Materialism." Journal of Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 3 (4): 381-92.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1943a. "Science , Philosophy, and Religion." The Humanist 3: 84-5.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1943b. "Verification of Categories: Existence and Substance" Journal of Philosophy 40 (8): 197-205.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1943c. "Causality and Substance." Philosophical Review.”.  52 (1): 1-27 (Reprinted in Ruth Goff, (ed.). 2008. Revitalizing Causality: Realism About Causality in Philosophy and Social Science. New York: Routledge: 26-45).
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1943d. "Reason and Revolution," Michigan Alumnus Quarterly Review  49: 212-14.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1943e. “Review of J. Maritain, Education at the Cross Roads.” The Humanist 3: 165-70.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1944a. "Causation and Perception." Philosophical Review 53 (6): 534-56.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1944b. "Reformed Materialism and Intrinsic Endurance." Philosophical Review. 53: 359-82.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1944c. "Is Naturalism Enough?" Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 41 (September): 533-44.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1944d. "Does Naturalism Need Ontology?" Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 41 (25): 686-94.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1944e. "Can a Reformed Materialism Do Justice to Values?" Ethics 55 (1): 28-45.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1944-45a. "The Meaning of True and False." Journal of Philosophy and Phenomenological Research  5 (1): 98-103.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1944-45b. "Reflections on Dialectical Materialism." Journal of Philosophy and Phenomenological Research  5 (2): 157-79.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1944-45c. "Knowing and Knowledge." Journal of Philosophy and Phenomenological Research  5 (3): 341-344.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1944-45d.  "Knowing through Propositions." Journal of Philosophy and Phenomenological Research  5 (3): 348-9.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1945-46. “Review of Yervant Krikorian, Naturalism and the Human Spirit." Journal of Philosophy and Phenomenological Research  6: 436-9.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1946a. "A Note on the Theory of Relativity." Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods  43 (12): 309-17.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1946b. "Materialism and Relativity: A Semantic Analysis." Philosophical Review 55 (1): 25-51.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1946c. "Philosophy and Physics of Relativity." Philosophy of Science 13 (3): 177-95.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1946-47. "Positivism and Materialism." Journal of Philosophy and Phenomenological Research  7 (1): 12-40.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1947. "Accept the Universe as a Going Concern." Religious Liberals Reply Henry Wieman, (ed.). Boston: Beacon Press.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1948a. "Do the Natural Sciences Have a Need of the Social Sciences?," Philosophy of Science  15 (2): 104-8.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1948b. "Naturalistic Humanism." Religion in the Twentieth Century Vergilius Ferm, (ed.). New York: Littlefield and Adams (later edition date 1958): 415-31.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1948c. “Review of A. N. Whitehead, Essays in Science and Philosophy." The Humanist  8: 92-3.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1949a. "Social Philosophy and the American Scene." Philosophy for the Future R. W. Sellars, V. J. McGill, and M. Farber, (ed.’s). New York: Macmillan: 61-75.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1949b. "Materialism and Human Knowing." Philosophy for the Future R. W. Sellars, V. J. McGill, and M. Farber, (ed’s). New York: Macmillan: 75-106.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1949c. "Resume of W. Cook Foundation Lectures.” (delivered by Ralph Barton Perry), Michigan Alumnus Quarterly Review 55: 185-94.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood, McGill, V.J., Farber, Marvin. 1949. Forward to Philosophy for the Future, R. W. Sellars, V. J. McGill, and M. Farber, (ed’s). New York: Macmillan: v-xii.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1949-50. “Review of Leslie A. White, The Science of Culture." Journal of Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 10: 586-7.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1950a. "Critical Realism and Modern Materialism." Philosophical Thought in France and the United States, Marvin Farber, (ed.). Buffalo: The University of Buffalo Publications: 463-82.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1950b. "The New Materialism." A History of Philosophical Systems V. Ferm, (ed.). New York: Philosophical Library: 418-28.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1950c. “Review of Frank Chapman Sharp, Good Will and Ill Will," The Humanist.  10: 277-8
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1950d. "Review of Leslie A. White, The Science of Culture." Michigan Alumnus Quarterly Review 56: 175-6.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1950-51. "The Spiritualism of Lavelle and Le Senne." Journal of Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 11 (3): 386-93.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1951. "Professor Goudge's Queries with Respect to Materialism." Philosophical Review 60 (2): 243-8.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1951-52a. "Review of R. W. Boynton, Beyond Mythology." Journal of Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 12: 146-8.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1951-52b.  "Review of Charles Mayer, “Man: Mind or Matter." Journal of Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 12: 436-42.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1952. “Le spiritualisme de Louis Lavelle et de René le sense.” Les Études Philosophiques 9(1/2): 30-40.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1955. "My Philosophical Position: A Rejoinder." Journal of Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 16 (1): 72-97.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1956a. "Physical Realism and Relativity: Some Unfinished Business." Philosophy of Science  23 (2): 75-81.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1956b. "Gestalt and Relativity: An Analogy." Philosophy of Science 23 (4): 275-279.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1957a. "Guided Causality, Using Reason and 'Free Will'." Journal of Philosophy 54 (August): 485-93.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1957b. "Philosophical Orientation and Peace." The Idea of War and Peace in Contemporary Philosophy Irving Louis Horowitz, (ed.). New York: vii-xx (The book was re-released by Literary Licensing Publisher in 2012).
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1959a. "Levels of Causality: The Emergence of Guidance and Reason in Nature." Journal of Philosophy and Phenomenological Research  20 (1): 1-17.
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  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1962. "American Critical Realism and British Theories of Sense Perception I and II." Methodos: 61-108.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1963. "Direct, Referential Realism." in Dialogue 2 (02): 135-43.         
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1965. "Existentialism, Realistic Empiricism, and Materialism." Journal of Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 25 (3): 315-32.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1968. Lending a Hand to Hylas. Ann Arbor: Edward Brothers.
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  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1970a. Principles of Emergent Realism. W. Preston Warren, (ed.) . St. Louis: Warren H. Green.
  • This book is really the best place to obtain an overview of R.W. Sellars’ writings with both extensive primary sources and commentary over the course of his development.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1970b. Social Patterns and Political Horizons. Nashville: Aurora Publishers.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1970c. Principles, Perspectives, and Problems of Philosophy. New York: Pageant Press International Corp.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1973a. Neglected Alternatives: Critical Essays by Roy Wood Sellars. William. Preston Warren, (ed.), Lewisburg: Bucknell University Press.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1973b. January-February. "Toward a New Humanist Manifesto." The Humanist
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1973c. "Recollections of Marvin Farber." In Phenomenology and Natural ExistenceDale Riepe, (ed.). Albany: State University of New York Press.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1975. Forward to William Preston Warren. Roy Wood Sellars. Boston: Twayne.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1991. “Philosophy of Organism and Physical Realism”. The Philosophy of Alfred North Whitehead. Paul A. Schlipp, (ed.). LaSalle: Open Court: 407-433 (Original publication date, 1941).

b. Secondary Sources

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  • Delaney, C. F. 1971. "Sellars and the Contemporary Mind-Body Problem," The New Scholasticism 45: 245-68.
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  • Ferm, Vergilius. 1950. “Varieties of Naturalism,” A History of Philosophical Systems. V. Ferm, (ed.). New York: Philosophical Library: 429-441.
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  • Gluck, Samuel E. 1971. Review of  Norman Paul Melchert’s Realism, Materialism, and the Mind: The Philosophy of Roy Wood Sellars. Springfield, Illinois: Charles C. Thomas. Philosophy 46 (177): 281ff.
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  • Iobst, Philip Kirschman. 1975. The Normative Philosophy of Roy Wood Sellars: A Critical Examination, Ph. D. Dissertation, State University of New York at Buffalo
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  • Kurtz, Paul. 1983. A Secular Humanist Declaration. Amherst, NY: Prometheus Books.
  • Kurtz, Paul. 2000. Humanist Manifesto 2000: A Call for a New Planetary Humanism. Amherst, NY: Prometheus Books.
  • Levine, Steven. 2007. “Sellars’ Critical Direct Realism,” International Journal of Philosophical Studies 15 (1): 53-76.
  • Kurtz, Paul. 2007. What is Secular Humanism? Amherst, NY: Prometheus Books.
  • Lamont, Corliss. 1997. The Philosophy of Humanism.  Washington, D.C: Humanist Press.
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  • Melchert, Norman Paul.  1964. “An Examination of the Physical Realism of Roy Wood Sellars.” PhD diss., University of Pennsylvania.
  • Melchert, Norman Paul.  1968. Realism, Materialism, and the Mind: The Philosophy of Roy Wood Sellars. Springfield, Ill.: Charles C. Thomas.
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  • Reck, Andrew. 1971. "The Realism of Roy Wood Sellars," The New Scholasticism. 45 (2): 209-44.
  • Sellars, Wilfrid. 1949. “Aristotelian Philosophies of Mind”. Philosophy for the Future, Roy Wood Sellars, V.J. McGill, Marvin Farber, (ed’s). New York: Macmillan: 544-570.
  • Sellars, Wilfrid. 1955. "Physical Realism," Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 15 (1): 13-32.
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  • Sellars, Wilfrid. 1965. “The Identity Approach to the Mind-Body Problem,” Review of Metaphysics 18 (March): 430-51.
  • Sellars, Wilfrid, 1971. "The Double-Knowledge Approach to the Mind-Body Problem," The New Scholasticism. 45 (2): 269-89. (Note that Roy had published an article with the same title in 1923)
  • Sellars, Wilfrid. 1991. “Philosophy and the Scientific Image of Man,” Science, Perception and Reality Atascadero, California: Ridgeview: 1-40.
  • Schaeffer, Francis. 2005. A Christian Manifesto. Wheaton, Illinois: Crossway Books.
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  • This book is probably the best sympathetic secondary source on R.W. Sellars’ views.
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Author Information

Richard McDonough
Arium School of Arts & Sciences

Kwasi Wiredu (1931— )

Kwasi Wiredu is a philosopher from Ghana, who has for decades been involved with a project he terms “conceptual decolonization” in contemporary African systems of thought.  By conceptual decolonization, Wiredu advocates a re-examination of current African epistemic formations in order to accomplish two aims.  First, he wishes to subvert unsavory aspects of tribal culture embedded in modern African thought so as to make that thought more viable.  Second, he intends to dislodge unnecessary Western epistemologies that are to be found in African philosophical practices.

In previously colonized regions of the world, decolonization remains a topical issue both at the highest theoretical levels and also at the basic level of everyday existence. After African countries attained political liberation, decolonization became an immediate and overwhelming preoccupation.  A broad spectrum of academic disciplines took up the conceptual challenges of decolonization in a variety of ways.  The disciplines of anthropology, history, political science, literature, and philosophy all grappled with the practical and academic conundrums of decolonization.

A central purpose in this article is to examine the contributions and limitations of African philosophy in relation to the history of the debate on decolonization.  In this light, it sometimes appears that African philosophy has been quite limited in defining the horizons of the debate when compared with the achievements of academic specialties such as literature and cultural studies. Thus, decolonization has been rightly conceived as a vast, global, and trans-disciplinary enterprise.

This analysis involves an examination of both the limitations and immense possibilities of Wiredu’s theory of conceptual decolonization.  First, the article offers a close reading of the theory itself and then locates it within the broader movement of modern African thought.  In several instances, Wiredu’s theory has proved seminal to the advancement of contemporary African philosophical practices.  It is also necessary to be aware of current imperatives of globalization, nationality, and territoriality and how they affect the agency of a theory such as ideological/conceptual decolonization.  Indeed, the notion of decolonization is far more complex than is often assumed.  Consequently, the epistemological resources by which it can be apprehended as a concept, ideology, or process are multiple and diverse.  Lastly, this article, as a whole, represents a reflection on the diversity of the dimensions of decolonization.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. Early Beginnings
  3. Decolonization as Epistemological Practice
  4. Tradition, Modernity and the Challenges of Development
  5. An African Reading of Karl Marx
  6. Conclusion
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

Kwasi Wiredu is one of Africa’s foremost philosophers, and he has done a great deal to establish the discipline of philosophy, in its contemporary shape, as a credible area of intellection in most parts of the African continent and beyond.  In order to appreciate the conceptual and historical contexts of his work, it is necessary to possess some familiarity with relevant discourses in African studies and history, anthropology, literature and postcolonial theory, particularly those advanced by Edward W. Said, Gayatri Spivak, Homi Bhabha, Abiola Irele and Biodun Jeyifo.  Wiredu’s contribution to the making of modern African thought provides an interesting insight into the processes involved in the formation of postcolonial disciplines and discourses, and it can also be conceived as a counter-articulation to the hegemonic discourses of imperial domination.

 Wiredu, for many decades, was involved with a project he termed conceptual decolonization in contemporary African systems of thought. This term entailed, for Wiredu, a re-examination of current African epistemic foundations in order to accomplish two main objectives.  First, he intended to undermine counter-productive facets of tribal cultures embedded in modern African, thought so as to make this body of thought both more sustainable and more rational.  Second, he intended to deconstruct the unnecessary Western epistemologies which may be found in African philosophical practices.

A broad spectrum of academic disciplines took up the conceptual challenges of decolonization in a variety of ways. In particular, the disciplines of anthropology, history, political science, literature and philosophy all grappled with the practical and academic challenges inherent to decolonization.

It is usually profitable to examine the contributions and limitations of African philosophers comparatively (along with other African thinkers who are not professional philosophers) in relation to the history of the debate on decolonization.  In addition to the scholars noted above, the discourse of decolonialization has benefitted from many valuable contributions made by intellectuals such as Frantz Fanon, Leopold Sedar Senghor, Cheikh Anta Diop, and Ngugi wa Thiongo.  In this light, it would appear that African philosophy has been, at certain moments, limited in defining the horizons of the debate when compared with the achievements of academic specialties such as literature, postcolonial theory and cultural studies. Thus, decolonization, as Ngugi wa Thiongo, the Kenyan cultural theorist and novelist, notes, must be conceived as a broad, transcontinental, and multidisciplinary venture.

Within the Anglophone contingent of African philosophy, the analytic tradition of British philosophy continues to be dominant.  This discursive hegemony had led an evident degree of parochialism.  This in turn has led to the neglect of many other important intellectual traditions.  For instance, within this Anglophonic sphere, there is not always a systematic interrogation of the limits, excesses and uses of colonialist anthropology in formulating the problematic of identity.  In this regard, the problematic of identity does not only refer to the question of personal agency but more broadly, the challenges of discursive identity.  This shortcoming is not as evident in Francophone traditions of African philosophy, which usually highlight the foundational discursive interactions between anthropology and modern African thought.  Thus, in this instance, there is an opening to other discursive formations necessary for the nurturing a vibrant philosophical practice.  Also, within Anglophone African philosophy, a stringent critique of imperialism and contemporary globalization does not always figure is not always significantly in the substance of the discourse, thereby further underlining the drawbacks of parochialism.  As such, it is necessary for critiques of Wiredu’s corpus to move beyond its ostensible frame to include critiques and discussions of traditions of philosophical practice outside the Anglophone divide of modern African thought (Osha, 2005).  Accordingly, such critiques ought not merely be a celebration of post-structuralist discourses to the detriment of African intellectual traditions.  Instead, they should be, among other things, an exploration of the discursive intimacies between the Anglophone and Francophone traditions of African philosophy.  In addition, an interrogation of other borders of philosophy is required to observe the gains that might accrue to the Anglophone movement of contemporary African philosophy, which, in many ways, has reached a discursive dead-end due to its inability to surmount the intractable problematic of identity, and its endless preoccupation with the question of its origins. These are the sort of interrogations that readings of Wiredu’s work necessitate. Furthermore, a study of Wiredu’s corpus (Osha, 2005) identifies—if only obliquely—the necessity to re-assess the importance of other discourses such as colonialist anthropology and various philosophies of black subjectivity in the formation of the modern African subject.  These are some of the central concerns which appear in Kwasi Wiredu and Beyond: The Text, Writing and Thought in Africa (2005).

2. Early Beginnings

Kwasi Wiredu was born in 1931 in Ghana and had his first exposure to philosophy quite early in life.  He read his first couple of books of philosophy in school around 1947 in Kumasi, the capital of Ashanti.  These books were Bernard Bosanquet’s The Essentials of Logic and C.E.M. Joad’s Teach Yourself Philosophy.  Logic, as a branch of philosophy attracted Wiredu because of its affinities to grammar, which he enjoyed.  He was also fond of practical psychology during the formative years of his life.  In 1950, whilst vacationing with his aunt in Accra, the capital of Ghana, he came across another philosophical text which influenced him tremendously.  The text was The Last Days of Socrates which had the following four dialogues by Plato: The Apology, Euthyphro, Meno and Crito. These dialogues were to influence, in a significant way, the final chapter of his first groundbreaking philosophical text, Philosophy and an African Culture (1980) which is also dialogic in structure.

He was admitted into the University of Ghana, Legon in 1952, to read philosophy, but before attending he started to study the thought of John Dewey on his own. However, mention must be made of the fact that C. E. M. Joad’s philosophy had a particularly powerful effect on him. Indeed, he employed the name J. E. Joad as his pen-name for a series of political articles he wrote for a national newspaper, The Ashanti Sentinel between 1950 and1951.  At the University of Ghana, he was instructed mainly in Western philosophy and he came to find out about African traditions of thought more or less through his own individual efforts.  He was later to admit that the character of his undergraduate education was to leave his mind a virtual tabula rasa, as far as African philosophy was concerned.  In other words, he had to develop and maintain his interests in African philosophy on his own. One of the first texts of African philosophy that he read was J. B. Danquah’s Akan Doctrine of God: A Fragment of Gold Coast Ethics and Religion.  Undoubtedly, his best friend William Abraham, who went a year before him to Oxford University, must have also influenced the direction of his philosophical research towards African thought.  A passage from an interview explains the issue of his institutional relation to African philosophy:

Prior to 1985, when I was in Africa, I devoted most of my time in almost equal proportions to research in African philosophy and in other areas of philosophy, such as the philosophy of logic, in which not much has, or is generally known to have, been done in African philosophy.  I did not have always to be teaching African philosophy or giving public lectures in African philosophy. There were others who were also competent to teach the subject and give talks in our Department of Philosophy.  But since I came to the United States, I have often been called upon to teach or talk about African philosophy.  I have therefore spent much more time than before researching in that area. This does not mean that I have altogether ignored my earlier interests, for indeed, I continue to teach subjects like (Western) logic and epistemology (Wiredu in Oladiop 2002: 332).

Wiredu began publishing relatively late, but has been exceedingly prolific ever since he started. During the early to mid 1970s, he often published as many as six major papers per year on topics ranging from logic, to epistemology, to African systems of thought, in reputable international journals.  His first major book, Philosophy and an African Culture (1980) is truly remarkable for its eclectic range of interests.  Paulin Hountondji, Wiredu’s great contemporary from the Republic of Benin, for many years had to deal with charges that his philosophically impressive corpus lacked ideological content and therefore merit from critics such as Olabiyi Yai (1977).  Hountondji (1983; 2002) in those times of extreme ideologizing, never avoided the required measure of socialist posturing.  Wiredu, on the other hand, not only avoided the lure of socialism but went on to denounce it as an unfit ideology.  Within the context of the socio-political moment of that era, it seemed a reactionary—even injurious—posture to adopt.  Nonetheless, he had not only laid the foundations of his project of conceptual decolonization at the theoretical level but had also begun to explore its various practical implications by his analyses of concepts such as “truth,” and also by his focused critique of some of the more counter-productive impacts of both colonialism and traditional culture.

By conceptual decolonization, Wiredu advocates a re-examination of current African epistemic formations in order to accomplish two objectives.  First, he wishes to subvert unsavoury aspects of indigenous traditions embedded in modern African thought so as to make it more viable.  Second, he intends to undermine the unhelpful Western epistemologies to be found in African philosophical traditions. On this important formulation of his he states:

By this I mean the purging of African philosophical thinking of all uncritical assimilation of Western ways of thinking. That, of course, would be only part of the battle won. The other desiderata are the careful study of our own traditional philosophies and the synthesising of any insights obtained from that source with any other insights that might be gained from the intellectual resources of the modern world.  In my opinion, it is only by such a reflective integration of the traditional and the modern that contemporary African philosophers can contribute to the flourishing of our peoples and, ultimately, all other peoples. (Oladipo, 2002: 328)

In spite of his invaluable contributions to modern African thought, it can be argued that Wiredu’s schema falls short as a feasible long term epistemic project.  Due to the hybridity of the postcolonial condition, projects seeking to retrieve the precolonial heritage are bound to be marred at several levels.  It would be an error for Wiredu or advocates of his project of conceptual decolonization to attempt to universalize his theory since, as Ngugi wa Thiongo argues, decolonization is a vast, global enterprise.  Rather, it is safer to read Wiredu’s project as a way of articulating theoretical presence for the de-agentialized and deterritorialized contemporary African subject.  In many ways, his project resembles those of Ngugi wa Thiongo and Cheikh Anta Diop.  Ngugi wa Thiongo advocates cultural and linguistic decolonization on a global scale and his theory has undergone very little transformation since its formulation in the 1960s.  Diop advances a similar set of ideas to Wiredu on the subject of vibrant modern African identities. Wiredu’s project is linked in conceptual terms to the broader project of political decolonization as advanced by liberationist African leaders such as Julius Nyerere, Jomo Kenyatta, Kwame Nkrumah, and Nnamdi Azikiwe.  But what distinguishes the particular complexion of his theory is its links with the Anglo-Saxon analytic tradition. This dimension is important in differentiating his project from those of his equally illustrious contemporaries such as V. Y. Mudimbe and Paulin Hountondji.  In fact, it can be argued that Wiredu’s theory of conceptual decolonization has more similarities with Ngugi wa Thiongo’s ideas regarding African cultural and linguistic agency than Mudimbe’s archeological excavations of African traces in Western historical and anthropological texts.

3. Decolonization as Epistemological Practice

In all previously colonized regions of the world, decolonization remains a topic of considerable academic interest.  Wiredu’s theory of conceptual decolonization is essentially what defines his attitudes and gestures towards the content of contemporary African thought.  Also it is an insight that is inflected by years of immersion into British analytic philosophy.  Wiredu began his reflections of the nature, legitimate aims, and possible orientations in contemporary African thought not as a result of any particular awareness of the trauma or violence of colonialism or imperialism but by a confrontation with the dilemma of modernity by the reflective (post)colonial African consciousness.  This dialectic origin can be contrasted with those of his contemporaries such as Paulin Hountondji and V. Y. Mudimbe.

Despite criticisms regarding some aspects of his work, in terms of founding a tradition for the practice of modern African philosophy, Wiredu’s contributions have been pivotal. He has also been very consistent in his output and the quality of his reflections regardless of some of their more obvious limitations.

As noted earlier, Wiredu was trained in a particular tradition of Western philosophy: the analytic tradition.  This fact is reflected in his corpus.  A major charge held against him is that his contributions could be made even richer if he had grappled with other relevant discourses: postcolonial theory, African feminisms, contemporary Afrocentric discourses and the global dimensions of projects and discourses of decolonization.

Kwasi Wiredu’s interests and philosophical importance are certainly not limited to conceptual decolonization alone.  He has offered some useful insights on Marxism, mysticism, metaphysics, and the general nature of the philosophical enterprise itself. Although his latter text, Cultural Universals and Particulars has a more Africa-centred orientation, his first book, Philosophy and an African Culture presents a wider range of discursive interests: a vigorous critique of Marxism, reflections on the phenomenon of ideology, analyses of truth and the philosophy of language, among other preoccupations. It is interesting to see how Wiredu weaves together these different preoccupations and also to observe how some of them have endured while others have not.

The volume Conceptual Decolonisation in African Philosophy is an apt summation of Wiredu’s philosophical interests with a decidedly African problematic while his landmark philosophical work, Philosophy and an African Culture, published first in 1980, should serve as a fertile source for more detailed elucidation.

In the second essay of Conceptual Decolonisation in African Philosophy entitled “The Need for Conceptual Decolonisation in African Philosophy”, Wiredu writes that “with an even greater sense of urgency the intervening decade does not seem to have brought any indications of a widespread realization of the need for conceptual decolonisation in African philosophy” (Wiredu, 1995: 23).  The intention at this juncture is to examine some of the ways in which Wiredu has been involved in the daunting task of conceptual decolonization.  Decolonization itself is a problematic exercise because it necessitates the jettisoning of certain conceptual attitudes that inform one’s worldviews.  Secondly, it usually entails an attempt at the retrieval of a more or less fragmented historical heritage.  Decolonization in Fanon’s conception entails this necessity for all colonized peoples and, in addition, it is “a programme of complete disorder” (Fanon, 1963:20).  This understanding is purely political and has therefore, a practical import.  This is not to say that Fanon had no plan for the project of decolonization in the intellectual sphere.  Also associated with this project as it was then conceived was a struggle for the mental liberation of the colonized African peoples.  It was indeed a program of violence in more senses than one.

However, with Wiredu, there isn’t an outright endorsement of violence, as decolonization in this instance amounts to conceptual subversion.  As a logical consequence, it is necessary to stress the difference between Fanon’s conception of decolonization and Wiredu’s.  Fanon is sometimes regarded as belonging to the same philosophical persuasion that harbours figures like Nkrumah, Senghor, Nyerere and Sekou Toure, “the philosopher-kings of early post-independence Africa” (Wiredu,1995:14), as Wiredu calls them.  This is so because they had to live out the various dramas of existence and the struggles for self and collective identity at more or less the same colonial/postcolonial moment.  Those “spiritual uncles” of professional African philosophers were engaged, as Wiredu states, in a strictly political struggle, and whatever philosophical insight they possessed was put at the disposal of this struggle, instead of a merely theoretical endeavour.  Obviously, Fanon was the most astute theoretician of decolonization of the lot.  In addition, for Fanon and the so-called philosopher-kings, decolonization was invested with a pan-African mandate and political appeal.  This crucial difference should be noted alongside what shall soon be demonstrated to be the Wiredu conception of decolonization.  Africans, generally, will have to continue to ponder the entire issue of decolonization as long as unsolved questions of identity remain and the challenges of collective development linger.  This type of challenge was foreseen by Fanon.

The end of colonialism in Africa and other Third World countries did not entail the end of imperialism and the dominance of the metropolitan countries.  Instead, the dynamics of dominance assumed a more complex, if subtle, form.  African economic systems floundered alongside African political institutions, and, as a result, various crises have compounded the seemingly perennial issue of underdevelopment.

A significant portion of post-colonial theory involves the entry of Third World scholars into the Western archive, as it were, with the intention of dislodging the erroneous epistemological assumptions and structures regarding their peoples.  This, arguably, is another variant of decolonization.  Wiredu partakes of this type of activity, but sometimes he carries the program even further.  Accordingly, he affirms:

Until Africa can have a lingua franca, we will have to communicate suitable parts of our work in our multifarious vernaculars, and in other forms of popular discourse, while using the metropolitan languages for international communication. (Wiredu, 1995:20)

This conviction has been a guiding principle with Wiredu for several years.  In fact, it is not merely a conviction; there are several instances within the broad spectrum of his philosophical corpus where he tries to put it into practice.  Two of such attempts are his essays “The Concept of Truth in the Akan Language” and “The Akan Concept of Mind.”  In the first of these articles, Wiredu states “there is no one word in Akan for truth” (Wiredu, 1985:46).  Similarly, he writes, “another linguistic contrast between Akan and English is that there is no word “fact” (Ibid.).  It is necessary to cite the central thesis of the essay; Wiredu writes that he wants “to make a metadoctrinal point which reflection on the African language enables us to see, which is that a theory of truth is not of any real universal significance unless it offers some account of the notion of being so” (Ibid.).

Wiredu’s argument here, needs to be firmer.  In many respects, he is only comparing component parts of the English language with the Akan language and not always with a view to drawing out “any real universal significance” as he says.  The entire approach seems to be irrevocably restrictive.  This is the distinction that lies between an oral culture and a textual one.  Most African intellectuals usually gloss over this difference, even though they may acknowledge it.  The difference is indeed very significant, because of the numerous imponderables that come into play.  Abiola Irele has been able to demonstrate the tremendous significance of orality in the constitution of modern African forms of literary expression.

However, Wiredu is more convincing in his essay “Democracy and Consensus in African Traditional Politics: A Plea for a Non-Party Polity”.  In this essay, Wiredu argues that the:

Ashanti system was a consensual democracy. It was a democracy because government was by the consent, and subject to the control, of the people as expressed through the representatives. It was consensual because, at least, as a rule, that consent was negotiated on the principle of consensus. (By contrast, the majoritarian system might be said to be, in principle, based on consent without consensus.) (Ibid. pp58-59)

When Wiredu broaches the issue of politics and its present and future contexts in postcolonial Africa, then we are compelled to visit a whole range of debates and discourses especially in the social sciences in Africa.  These arearguably more directly concerned with questions pertaining to governance, democracy, and the challenges of contemporary globalization.

Another essay by Wiredu, entitled “The Akan Concept of Mind” is also an attempt of conceptual recontextualization.  Wiredu begins by stating that he is restricting himself to a study of the Akans of Ghana in order “to keep the discussion within reasonable anthropological bounds” (Wiredu, 1983:113).  His objective is a modest but nevertheless important one, since it fits quite well with his entire philosophical project which, as noted, is concerned with ironing out philosophical issues “on independent grounds” and possibly in one’s own language and the metropolitan language bequeathed by the colonial heritage.

It is therefore appropriate to proceed gradually, traversing the problematic interfaces between various languages in search of satisfactory structures of meaning.  The immediate effect is a radical diminishing of the entire concept of African philosophy, a term which under these circumstances would become even more problematic.  The consequence of Wiredu’s position is that to arrive at the essence of African philosophy, it would be necessary to dismantle its monolithic structure to make it more context-bound.  First, Africa as a spatial entity would require further re-drawing of its often problematic geography.  Second, a new thematics to mediate between the general and the particular would have to be found.  Third, the critique of unanimism and ethnophilosophy would be driven into more contested terrains.  These are some of the likely challenges posed by Wiredu’s approach.

Furthermore, in dealing with the traditional Akan conceptual system, or any other, for that matter, it should be borne in mind that what is in contention is “a folk philosophy, a body of originally unwritten ideas preserved in the oral traditions, customs and usages of a people” (Ibid.).

It would be appropriate to examine more closely his article “The Akan Concept of Mind”.  Here, Wiredu enumerates the ways in which the English conception of mind differs markedly from that of the Akan, due in a large part to certain fundamental linguistic dissimilarities.  He also makes the point that “the Akans most certainly do not regard mind as one of the entities that go to constitute a person” (Ibid. 121).  It is significant to note this, but at the same time, it is difficult to imagine the ultimate viability of this approach.  Indeed after reformulating traditional Western philosophical problems to suit African conditions, it remains to be seen how African epistemological claims can be substantiated using the natural and logical procedures available to African systems of thought.  As such, it is possible to argue that this conceptual manoeuvre would eventually degenerate into a dead-end of epistemic nativism.  These are the kinds of issues raised by Wiredu’s project.

As such, inherent in the thrust for complete decolonization is the presence of colonial violence itself.  In addition, there is essentially a latent desire for epistemic violence, as well as difficulties concerning the negotiation of linguistic divides. In the following quotation, for example, Wiredu attempts to demonstrate the significance of some of those differences:

By comparison with the conflation of concepts of mind and soul prevalent in Western philosophy, the Akan separation of the “Okra” from “adwene” suggests a more analytical awareness of the sanctification of human personality. (Ibid.128)

It is necessary to substantiate more rigorously claims such as this because we may also be committing an error in establishing certain troublesome linguistic or philosophical correspondences between two disparate cultures and traditions.

Another crucial, if distressing, feature of decolonization as advanced by Wiredu is that it always has to measure itself up with the colonizing Other, that is, it finds it almost impossible to create its own image so to speak by the employment of autochthonous strategies.  This is not to assert that decolonization always has to avail itself of indigenous procedures, but the very concept of decolonization is in fact concerned with breaking away from imperial structures of dominance in order to express a will to self-identity or presence.  To be sure, the Other is always present, defacing all claims to full presence of the decolonizing subject.  This is a contradictory but inevitable trope within the postcolonial condition.  The Other is always there to present the criteria by which self-identity is adjudged either favourably or unfavourably. There is no getting around the Other as it is introduced in its own latent and covert violence, in the hesitant counter-violence of the decolonizing subject and invariably in the counter-articulations of all projects of decolonization.

4. Tradition, Modernity and the Challenges of Development

Wiredu’s later attempts at conceptual decolonization have been quite interesting.  An example of such an attempt is the essay “Custom and Morality: A Comparative Analysis of some African and Western Conceptions of Morals.”  He is able to explore at greater length some of the conceptual confusions that arise as a result of the transplantation of Western ideas within an African frame of reference.  This wholesale transference of foreign ideas and conceptual models has caused the occurrence of severe cases of identity crises and, to borrow a more apposite term, colonial mentality.  Indeed, one of the aims of Wiredu’s efforts at conceptual decolonization is to indicate instances of colonial mentality and determine strategies by which they can be minimized.  Accordingly he is quite convincing when he argues that polygamy in a traditional setting amounts to efficient social thinking but is most inappropriate within a modern framework.  In this way, Wiredu is offering a critique of a certain traditional practice that ought to be discarded on account of the demands and realities of a modern economy.

On another level, it appears that Wiredu has not sufficiently interrogated the distance between orality and textuality.  If indeed he has done so, he would be rather more skeptical about the manner in which he thinks he can dislodge certain Western philosophical structures embedded in the African consciousness.

Wiredu has always believed that traditional modes of thought and folk philosophies should be interpreted, clarified, analyzed and subjected to critical evaluation and assimilation (Wiredu, 1980: x).  Also, at the beginning of his philosophical reflections, he puts forth the crucial formulation that there is no reason why the African philosopher “in his philosophical meditations […] should not test formulations in those against intuitions in his own language” (Wiredu, 1980: xi).  And, rather than merely discussing the possibilities for evolving modern traditions in African philosophy, African philosophers should actually begin to do so (Hountondji, 1983).  In carrying out this task, the African philosopher has a few available methodological approaches.  First, he is urged to “acquaint himself with the different philosophies of the different cultures of the world, not to be encylopaedic or eclectic, but with the aim of trying to see how far issues and concepts of universal relevance can be disentangled from the contingencies of culture” (Wiredu, 1980: 31).  He also adds that “the African philosopher has no choice but to conduct his philosophical inquiries in relation to the philosophical writings of other peoples, for his ancestors left him no heritage of philosophical writings” (Wiredu, 1980: 48).  For Wiredu, the use of translations is a fundamental aspect of contemporary African philosophical practices.  However, on the dilemmas of translation in the current age of neoliberalism, it has been noted: “translations are [..] put ‘out of joint.’  However correct or legitimate they may be, and whatever right one may acknowledge them to have, they are all disadjusted, as it were unjust in the gap that affects them.  This gap is within them, to be sure, because their meanings remain necessarily equivocal; next it is in the relation among them and thus their multiplicity, and finally or first of all in the irreducible inadequation to the other language and to the stroke of genius of the event that makes the law, to all the virtualities of the original” (Derrida, 1994:19).  Wiredu does not contemplate the implications of this kind of indictment in his formulations of an approach to African philosophy.  Perhaps the task at hand is simply too important and demanding to cater to such philosophical niceties.  In relation to the kind of philosophical heritage at the disposal of the African philosopher, Wiredu identifies three main strands; “a folk philosophy, a written traditional philosophy and a modern philosophy” (Wiredu, 1980:46).  Wiredu’s approach to questions of this sort is embedded in his general theoretical stance: “It is a function, indeed a duty, of philosophy in any society to examine the intellectual foundations of its culture.  For any such examination to be of any real use, it should take the form of reasoned criticism and, where possible, reconstruction. No other way to philosophical progress is known than through criticism and adaptation” (Wiredu, 1980: 20).

The drive to attain progress is not limited to philosophical discourse alone.  Entire communities and cultures usually aim to improve upon their institutions and practices in order to remain relevant.  Societies can lose the momentum of growth and “various habits of thought and practice can become anachronistic within the context of the development of a given society; but an entire society too can become anachronistic within the context of the whole world if the ways of life within it are predominantly anachronistic.  In the latter case, of course, there is no discarding society; what you do is to modernize it” (Wiredu, 1980:1).  The theme of modernization occurs frequently in Wiredu’s corpus.  He does not fully conceptualize it nor relate it to the various ideological histories it has encountered in the domains of social science, where it became a fully fledged discipline. Modernization, for him, is based on an uncomplicated pragmatism that owes much to Deweyan thought.

This kind of posture, that is, the consistent critique of the retrogression inherent in tradition and its proclivity for the fossilization of culture, is directed at Leopold Sedar Senghor.  On Senghor, he writes, “it is almost as if he has been trying to exemplify in his own thought and discourse the lack of the analytical habit which he has attributed to the biology of the African.  Most seriously of all, Senghor has celebrated the fact our (traditional) mind is of a non-analytical bent; which is very unfortunate, seeing that this mental attribute is more of a limitation than anything else” (Wiredu, 1980:12).  Wiredu’s main criticism of Senghor is one that is always leveled against the latter.  Apart from that charge that Senghor essentializes the concept and ideologies of blackness, he is also charged with defeatism that undermines struggles for liberation and decolonization.  However, Paul Gilroy has unearthed a more sympathetic context in which to read and situate Senghorian thought.  In Gilroy’s reading, an acceptable ideology of blackness emerges from Senghor’s work. And in this way, Wiredu’s critique loses some of its originality.

Senghor is cast as a traditionalist and tradition itself is the subject of a much broader critique.  On some of the drawbacks of tradition Wiredu writes,

it is as true in Africa as anywhere else that logical, mathematical, analytical, experimental procedures are essential in the quest for the knowledge of, and control over, nature and therefore, in any endeavour to improve the condition of man. Our traditional culture was somewhat wanting in this respect and this is largely responsible for the weaknesses of traditional technology, warfare, architecture, medicine….” (Wiredu, 1980: 12) (italics mine)

Sometimes, Wiredu carries his critique of tradition too far as when he advances the view that “traditional medicine is terribly weak in diagnosis and weaker still in pharmacology” (Wiredu, 1980: 12).  In recent times, a major part of Hountondji’s project is to demonstrate that traditional knowledges are not only useful and viable but also the necessity to situate them in appropriate modern contexts.  Hountondji’s latest gesture is curious since both he and Wiredu are supposed to belong to the same philosophic tendency as described by Bodunrin under the rubric of West-led universalism.  However, Wiredu’s attack on tradition is vitiated by his project of conceptual decolonization which, in order to work, requires the recuperation of vital elements in traditional culture.

Wiredu’s stance in relation to modernization and tradition gets refined by his condemnation of some aspects of urban existence which exhibit a manifestation of postmodern environmentalism. First, he writes, “it is quite clear to me that unrestricted industrial urbanization is contrary to any humane culture; it is certainly contrary to our own” (Wiredu, 1980:22). Also, “one of the powerful strains on our extended family system is the very extensive poverty which oppresses out rural populations. Owing to this, people working in the towns and cities are constantly burdened with the financial needs of rural relatives which they usually cannot entirely satisfy”(Wiredu, 1980:22). Contemporary anthropological studies dealing with Africa have dwelt extensively on this phenomenon. The point is, in Africa, forms of sociality exists that can no longer be found in the North Atlantic civilization. If this civilization (the North Atlantic) is characterized by extreme individualism, African forms of social existence on the other hand tend towards the gregarious in which conceptions of generosity, corruption, gratitude, philanthropy, ethnicity  and even justice take on different slightly forms from what obtains within the vastly different North Atlantic context.

Also problematic is Wiredu’s reading of colonialism which is very similar to those of authors such as Ngugi wa Thiongo, Walter Rodney or even Chinua Achebe. In this reading, the colonized is abused, brutalized, silenced and reconstructed against her/his own will.  Colonialism causes the destruction of agency. On de-agentialization, Wiredu states, “any human arrangement is authoritarian if it entails any person being made to do or suffer something against his will, or if it leads to any person being hindered in the development of his own will” (Wiredu, 1980:2).  Homi Bhabha advances the notion of ambivalence to highlight the cultural reciprocities inherent in the entire colonial encounter and structure. This kind of reading of the colonial event has led to a rethinking of colonial theory. But Wiredu’s reading of the colonial encounter is infected by the radical persuasion of early African theorists of decolonization: “The period of colonial struggle was […] a period of cultural affirmation. It was necessary to restore in ourselves our previous confidence which had been so seriously eroded by colonialism. We are still, admittedly, even in post-colonial times, in an era of cultural self-affirmation” (Ibid.59).

5. An African Reading of Karl Marx

Marxist theory and discourse generally provided many African intellectuals with a platform on which to conduct many sociopolitical struggles. In fact, for many African scholars, it served as the only ideological tool. But not all scholars found Marxism acceptable. Wiredu was one of the scholars who has deep reservations about it. But he is not in doubt about the philosophical significance of Marx: “I regard Karl Marx as one of the great philosophers” (Wiredu, 1980:63). Derrida is even more forthcoming on the depth of this significance: “It will always be a fault not to read and reread and discuss Marx- which is to say also a few others- and to go beyond scholarly “reading” or “discussion.” It will be more and more a fault, a failing of theoretical, philosophical, political responsibility” (Derrida, 1994:13). Again, he writes, “the Marxist inheritance was- and still remains, and so it will remain- absolutely and thoroughly determinate. One need not be a Marxist or a communist in order to accept this obvious fact. We all live in a world, some would say a culture, that bears, at an incalculable depth, the mark of this inheritance, whether in a directly visible fashion or not”(Ibid.).

Marxism during era of the Cold War was the major ideological issue and in the present age of neoliberalism it continues to haunt (Derrida’s precise phrase is hauntology) us with its multiple legacies. Wiredu’s critique of Marx and Engels is located within the epoch of the Cold War. But from it, we get a glimpse of not only his political orientation but also his philosophical predilections. For instance, at a point, he claims “the food one eats, the hairstyle one adopts, the amount of money one has, the power one wields- all these and such circumstances are irrelevant from an epistemological point of view” (Wiredu, 1980:66). But Foucault-style analyses have demonstrated that these seemingly marginal activities have a tremendous impact on knowledge/power configurations that are often difficult to ignore. Michel de Certeau has demonstrated these so-called inconsequential acts become significant as gestures of resistance for the benefit of the weak and politically powerless. In his words, “the weak must continually turn to their own ends forces alien to them” (de Certeau 1984: xix). On those specific acts of the weak, he writes, “many everyday practices (talking, reading, moving about, shopping, cooking, etc.) are tactical in character. And so are, more generally, many “ways of operating”: victories of the “weak” over the “strong” (whether the strength be that of powerful people or the violence of things or of an imposed order, etc.), clever tricks, knowing how to get away with things, “hunter’s cunning,” maneuvers, polymorphic simulations, joyful discoveries, poetic  as well as warlike. The Greeks called these “ways of operating” metis (Ibid.). This reading gives an entirely different perspective on acts and themes of resistance as panoptical surveillance in the age of global neoliberalism becomes more totalitarian in nature at specific moments.

As a philosopher versed in analytic philosophy, truth is a primary concern of Wiredu and this concern is incorporated into his analysis of Marxist philosophy. Hence, he identifies the following points, “the cognition of truth is recognized by Engels as the business of philosophy; (2) What is denied is absolute truth, not truth as such; (3) The belief, so finely expressed, in the progressive character of truth; (4) Engels speaks of this process of cognition as the ‘development of science.’ (5) That a consciousness of limitation is a necessary element in all acquired knowledge” (Wiredu,1980:64-65). Wiredu explains that these various Marxian assertions on truth are no different from those of the logician, C. S. Peirce who had expounded them under a formulation he called “fallibilism.” John Dewey also expounded them under the concept of ‘pragmatism’(Ibid.67). So the point here is that some of the main Marxist propositions on truth have parallels in analytic philosophy. Nonetheless, this raises an unsettling question about Marxism and its relation to truth: “How is it that a philosophy which advocates such an admirable doctrine as the humanistic conception of truth tends so often to lead in practice to the suppression of freedom of thought and expression? Is it by accident that this comes to be so? Or is it due to causes internal to the philosophy of Marx and Engels”(Ibid.68). Wiredu demonstrates strong reservations about what Ernest Wamba dia Wamba calls ‘bureaucratic socialism.” Derrida on his part, urges us to distinguish between Marx as a philosopher and the innumerable specters of Marx. In other words, there is a difference between “the dogma machine and the “Marxist” ideological apparatuses (States, parties, cells, unions, and other places of doctrinal production)”(Derrida,1994:13)  and the necessity to treat Marx as a great philosopher. We need to “try to play Marx off against Marxism so as to neutralize, or at any rate muffle the political imperative in the untroubled exegesis of classified work” (Ibid.31).  We also need to remember that “he doesn’t belong to the communists, to the Marxists, to the parties, he ought to figure within our great canon of […] political philosophy” (Ibid.31).

Wiredu’s reading of Marxism generally is quite damaging. First, he states, “Engels himself, never perfectly consistent, already compromises his conception of truth with some concessions to absolute truth in Anti-Duhring” (Wiredu, 1980:68). He then makes an even more damaging accusation that a form of authoritarianism lies at the heart of conception of philosophy propagated by Marx and Engels.  On what he considers to a deep-seated confusion in their work, he writes, “Engels recognizes the cognition of truth to be a legitimate business of philosophy and makes a number of excellent points about truth. As soon, however, as one tries to find out what he and Marx conceived philosophy to be like, one is faced with a deep obscurity. The problem resolves round what one may describe as Marx’s conception of philosophy as ideology” (Ibid.70). Here, Wiredu makes the crucial distinction between Marx as a philosopher and the effects of his numerous spectralities and for this reason he offers his most important criticism of his general critique of Marxism. He also accuses Marx of instances of “carelessness in the use of cardinal terms” which he says “may be symptomatic of deep inadequacies of thought”(Ibid.74). This charge, which relates to Marx’s conception of consciousness is indeed serious since it borders on the question of conceptual clarification as advanced by the canon of analytic philosophy. Wiredu argues that Marx and Engels are unclear about their employment of the concept of ideology: “Marx and Engels are […] on the horns of a dilemma. If all philosophical thinking is ideological, then their thinking is ideological and, by their hypothesis, false”(Ibid.76). Wiredu’s insights are very important here: “He and Engels simply assumed for themselves the privilege of exempting their own philosophizing from the ideological theory of ideas”(Ibid.77). Consequently, Marx commits a grave error “in his conception of ideology and its bearing upon philosophy”(Ibid.81).

Another area Wiredu finds Marx and Engels wanting is moral philosophy. In other words, Marx “confused moral philosophy with moralism and assumed rather than argued a moral standpoint”(Ibid.79). Furthermore, he had precious little to say on the nature of the relationship between philosophy and morality. Engels does better on this score as there is a treatment of morality in Anti-Duhring. Nonetheless, Engels is charged with giving “no guidance on the conceptual problems that have perplexed moral philosophers” (Ibi.80). Henceforth, Wiredu becomes increasing dismissive of Marx, Marxism and its followers. First, he writes, “the run-of the-mill Marxists, even less enamoured of philosophical accuracy than their masters, have made the ideological conception of philosophy a battle cry”(Ibid.80). And then he singles out ‘scientific socialism’ which he regards as being unclear in its elaboration and which he typifies as “an amalgam of factual and evaluative elements blended together without regard to categorical stratification”(Ibid.85). In one of his most damaging assessments of Marxism, he declares: “Ideology is the death of philosophy. To the extent to which Marxism, by its own internal incoherences, tends to be transformed into an ideology, to that extent Marxism is a science of the unscientific and a philosophy of the unphilosophic” (Ibid.87).

In sum, Wiredu general attitude towards Marxism is one of condemnation. However, in the contemporary re-evaluations of Marxism a few discursive elements need to be clarified; the inclusion of the demarcation of Cold War and post Cold War assessments of Marxism ought to be employed as an analytical yardstick and also the necessity to sift through the various specters and legacies of Marx as distinct from those of Marxism. This is the kind of reading that Derrida urges us to do and it is also one to which we shall now turn our attention.

Derrida states it is imperative to distinguish between the legacies of Marx and the various spectralities of Marxism. In addition to this distinction we might add another crucial one: analyses of Marxism before and after the fall of the former Soviet Union. Wiredu’s critique is based on the pre-Soviet debacle whilst Derrida’s draws some of his reflections based on the post-Soviet fall. In these two different critiques, we must be careful to always strive to isolate the theoretical elements and insights that bypass short-lived discursive trends and political interests which often tend to vitiate the more profound effects of the works of Karl Marx and those that do not.

The debacle of the former Soviet Union and the apparent hegemony of neoliberal ideology have generated discourses associated with the “ends” of discourse. But Derrida points out that there is nothing new in the contemporary proclamations affirming the end of discourses which are in fact anachronistic when compared to the earlier versions of the same discursive orientation that emerged in the 1950s and which in a vital sense owed a great deal to a certain spirit of Marx: “the eschatological themes of the “end of history,” of the “end of Marxism,” of the “end of philosophy,” of the “ends of man,” of the “last man” and so forth were, in the ‘50s, that is, forty years ago our daily bread. We had this bread of apocalypse in our mouths naturally, already, just as naturally as that which I nicknamed after the fact, in 1980, the “apocalyptic tone in philosophy” (Derrida, 1994:14-15). In a way, in fact the contemporary discourses of endism that draw from the spirit of neoliberal triumphalism, without acknowledging it, are greatly indebted to Marxism and the more constructive critiques of it. Deconstruction, in part, emerged from the necessity to critique the various forms of statist Stalinism, the numerous socio-economic failings of Soviet bureaucracy and the political repression in Hungary. In other words, it emerged partly from the need to organize critiques for degraded forms of socialism.

In speaking about the inheritance of Marx, Derrida also reflects on the injunction associated with it. The task of reflecting on this inheritance and the injunction to which it gives rise is demanding: … “one must filter, sift, criticize, one must sort out several different possibles that inhabit the same injunction. And inhabit it in a contradictory fashion around a secret. If the readability of a legacy were given, natural, transparent, univocal, if it did not call for and at the same time defy interpretation, we would never have anything to inherit from it” (Ibid.16). Derrida’s employment of terms and phrases such “inheritance,” “injunction,” and the “spectrality of the specter” in relation to the legacies of Marx has to do with the question of the genius of Marx: “Whether evil or not, a genius operates, it always resists and defies after the fashion of a spectral thing. The animated work becomes that thing, the Thing that, like an elusive specter, engineers [s’ingenie] a habitation without proper inhabiting, call it is a haunting, of both memory and translation” (Ibid.18).

A work of genius, a masterpiece in addition to giving rise to spectralities also generates legions of imitators and followers. Of the Marxists who came after Marx, Wiredu writes; “I find that Marxists are especially prone to confuse factual with ideological issues. Undoubtedly, the great majority of those who call themselves Marxists do not share the ideology of Marx”(Wiredu,1980:94). In order to transcend the violence and confusion of Marxists who misread Marx, we need “to play Marx off against Marxism so as to neutralize, or at any rate muffle the political imperative in the untroubled exegesis of a classified work”(Derrida,1994:31). The work of re-reading Marx, of re-establishing his philosophical value and importance is a task needs to be performed in universities, conferences, colloquia and also in less academic sites and fora.

Within the contemporary cultural moment, new configurations have arisen that were not present during Marx’s day. Indeed, “a set of transformations of all sorts (in particular, techno-scientific-economic-media) exceeds both the traditional givens of the Marxist discourse and those of the liberal discourse opposed to it”(Ibid.70). Also,

Electoral representativity or parliamentary life is not only distorted, as was always the case, by a great number of socio-economic mechanisms, but it is exercised with more and more difficulty in a public space profoundly upset by techno-tele-media apparatuses and by new rhythms of information and communication, by the devices and the speed of forces represented by the latter, but also and consequently by the new modes of appropriation they put to work, by the new structure of the event and of its spectrality that they produce.” (Ibid.79)

Here, the instructive point is that the new information technologies have radically transformed the possibilities of the event and the modes of its production, reception and also interpretation. But there is a far more radical change that has occurred and which signals a profound crisis of global capitalism and the neoliberal ideology that underpins it: “For what must be cried out, at a time when some have the audacity to neo-evangelize in the name of the ideal of liberal democracy that has finally realized itself  as the ideal of human history: never have violence, inequality, exclusion, famine, and thus economic oppression affected as many human beings in the history of the earth and of humanity”(Ibid.85). Also, “never have so many men, women, and children been subjugated, starved, or exterminated on the earth.” (Ibid.)

So Derrida identifies a few new factors that need to be included in the critique of Marxism in the contemporary moment namely the phenomenon of spectralization caused by techno-science and digitalization, the weakening of the practice of liberal democracy and also the crises and multiple contradictions inherent in global capitalism. It is necessary to include another element into the present configuration which is the rise of political Islam as an alternative ideology, its subsequent fervent politicization and its Western reconstruction into an ideology of terror.

Wiredu’s reading of Marx focuses on the conceptual infelicities in the latter’s theorizations of notions such as “ideology,” “consciousness,” and “truth.” Wiredu also criticizes Marx’s project of moral philosophy or in fact the lack of it. On the whole, his reading isn’t complementary. Indeed, it amounts to a dismissal of Marx in spite of the attempt to read him without the obfuscations of innumerable legacies.

6. Conclusion

Arguably, Wiredu’s particular contribution to the debate on the origins, status, problematic and future of contemporary African philosophy resides in his formulations regarding his theory of conceptual decolonization. His approach in formulating this theory of discursive agency and more specifically philosophical practice involves the incorporation of a form bi-culturalism. In other words, his approach entails analyses of the canon of Western philosophy and also the manifestations of tribal cultures as a way of attaining a conceptual synthesis. Indeed, this schema involves a forceful element of bi-culturalism as a matter of logical consequence as well as a high level of [multi] bi-lingual competence. As such, it not only an exercise in conceptual synthesis but it is also a project involving comparative linguistics.

In Anglophone parts of Africa, Wiredu’s experience and research in teaching African philosophy has had a tremendous significance. The positive aspect of this is that the study of African philosophical thought has in positive moments transcended the problematic of identity or what has been termed as the problematic of origins. The less complimentary dimension of this equation is that Wiredu’s discoveries have given rise to (most undoubtedly unwittingly) a somewhat hegemonic school of disciples that is fostering a delimiting academicism and which is contrary to his essential spirit of conceptual inventiveness. As such, it might become necessary not only to critique Wiredu’s corpus but perhaps also Wiredu’s school of disciples which rather than appreciate the originality of his formulations fall instead for the pitfalls of over-ideologization.

Undoubtedly, Wiredu discovered a challenging path in modern African thought in which he sometimes takes the meaning of the existence of African philosophy for granted. In addition, it has been observed that also lacking at some moments in his oeuvre is an attempt to de-totalize and hence particularize the components of what he regards of the foundations of African philosophy.  In other words, African philosophy finds its form, shape and also its conceptual moorings above the discursive platform provided by Western philosophy. In addition, the theoretical space made available for its articulation is derived from the same Western-donated pool of unanimism. Part of recent interrogations of Wiredu’s work includes a questioning of the legitimacy of that space as the only site on which to construct an entire philosophical practice for the alienated, hybrid African consciousness. Oftentimes the question is posed, what are the ways by which the space can be broadened?

Indeed, terms such as reflective integration and due reflection offer the critical spaces for the theoretical articulation of something whose existence has not yet been concretely conceived. So in Wiredu’s corpus we see the very familiar problematic involving the tradition/modernity dichotomy being played out. Finally, it can be argued that this tension is not quite resolved but fortunately it is also a tension that never jeopardizes his philosophical inventiveness. Rather, it seems to animate his reflections in unprecedented ways.

7. References and Further Reading

  • Cronon, D. E. 1955. Black Moses: The Story of Marcus Garvey and the Universal Negro Improvement Association, Wisconsin: University of Wisconsin Press.
  • Cummings, Robert. 1986. “Africa between the Ages” in African Studies Review, Vol. 29, No. 3, September.
  • Diop, Cheikh, Anta, 1974. The African Origin of Civilization: Myth or Reality? Trans. M. Cook, Westport, Conn.: Lawrence Hill.
  • Doortmont, Michel R. 2005 The Pen-Pictures of Modern Africans and African Celebrities by Charles Francis Hutchison,  Leiden and Boston: Brill.
  • Dubow, Saul. 2000 The African National Congress, Johannesburg: Jonathan Ball.
  • Derrida, Jacques. 1994. Specters of Marx: the state of the debt, the work of mourning, & the new international, trans. Peggy Kamuf, New York: Routledge.
  • Gates Jr., H. L. 1992. Loose Canons, New York: OxfordUniversity Press.
  • Fanon, Frantz. 1967 Black Skin, White Masks (trans. C. Van Markmann) New York: Grove Press.
  • Fanon, Frantz. 1963 The Wretched of the Earth, London: Penguin.
  • Foucault, Michel. 1974 The Order of Things: An Archaeology of the Human Sciences. New York: Pantheon.
  • Foucault, Michel. 1977 Discipline and Punish: The Birth of the Prison. Trans A. M. Sheridan-Smith. London: Allen Lane.
  • Foucault, Michel. 1980 Language, Counter-Memory and Practice. Selected Essays and Interviews. Ed. Donald Bouchard, Ithaca, NY: CornellUniversity Press.
  • Foucault, Michel. 1982 The Archaeology of Knowledge. New York: Pantheon.
  • Foucault, Michel. 1991 “Governmentality” in G. Burchell, C. Gordon and P. Miller, eds, The Foucault Effect.Chicago: Chicago University Press.
  • Hountondji, Paulin. 1983 African Philosophy: Myth and Reality, London: Hutchinson and Co.
  • Hountondji, Paulin.  2002 The Struggle for Meaning: Reflections on Philosophy, Culture and Democracy in Africa, Athens: Ohio University Center for International Studies.
  • Masolo, D.A. 1994 African Philosophy in Search of Identity Bloomington and Indianapolis: IndianaUniversity Press.
  • Mudimbe V.Y. 1988 The Invention of Africa Bloomington and Indianapolis: IndianaUniversity Press.
  • Mudimbe V.Y. 1994. The Idea of Africa,Bloomington and Indianapolis: IndianaUniversity Press.
  • Oladipo,  Olusegun. ed. 2002  The Third Way in African Philosophy:Essays in Honour of Kwasi WireduIbadan: Hope Publications Ltd.
  • Osha, Sanya, 2005 Kwasi Wiredu and Beyond: The Text, Writing and Thought in Africa, Dakar: Codesria.
  • Soyinka, Wole, 1976 Myth, Literature and the African World Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Soyinka, Wole,   1988 Art, Dialogue and Outrage Ibadan: New Horn Press.
  • Soyinka, Wole, 1996 The Open Sore of a Continent New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Soyinka, Wole.  1999 The Burden of Memory, The Muse of Forgiveness New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Soyinka, Wole. 2000 “Memory, Truth and Healing” in The Politics of Memory, Truth, Healing and Social Justice, eds. I. Amaduime and A. An-Na’im, London: Zed Books
  • Wa Thiongo, Ngugi. 1972 HomecomingLondon, Ibadan, Lusaka: Heinemann.
  • Wa Thiongo, Ngugi. 1981 Writers in PoliticsNairobi: Heinemann.
  • Wa Thiongo, Ngugi. 1986 Decolonising the MindNairobi: E.A.E.P.
  • Wa Thiongo, Ngugi. 1993 Moving the CentreLondon: James Currey.
  • Wiredu, Kwasi. Philosophy and an African CultureCambridge: CambridgeUniversity Press, 1980.
  • Wiredu, Kwasi.  1983 “The Akan Concept of Mind” in Ibadan Journal of Humanistic Studies, No. 3.
  • Wiredu, Kwasi. 1985 “The Concept of Truth in Akan Language” in P.O. Bodunrin ed. Philosophy in Africa: Trends and Perspectives, Ile-Ife: University of Ife Press.
  • Wiredu, Kwasi. and Gyekye, Kwame. 1992 Persons and Community. Washington, D.C.: The Council for Research in Values and Philosophy.
  • Wiredu, Kwasi. 1993 “Canons of Conceptualisation” in The Monist: An International Journal of General Philosophical Inquiry Vol. 76, No. 4 October.
  • Wiredu, Kwasi. 1995 Conceptual Decolonization in African PhilosophyIbadan: Hope Publications.
  • Wiredu, Kwasi.  1996 Cultural Universals and ParticularsBloomington and Indianapolis: IndianaUniversity Press.
  • Yai, Olabiyi. 1977 “The Theory and Practice in African Philosophy: The Poverty of Speculative Philosophy,” Second Order: An African Journal of Philosophy, Vol.VI, No.2.


Author Information

Sanya Osha
Tshwane University of Technology
South Africa

Xenophon (430—354 B.C.E.)

XenophonXenophon was a Greek philosopher, soldier, historian, memoirist, and the author of numerous practical treatises on subjects ranging from horsemanship to taxation.  While best known in the contemporary philosophical world as the author of a series of sketches of Socrates in conversation, known by their Latin title Memorabilia, Xenophon also wrote a Symposium and an Apology which present a set of vivid and intriguing portraits of Socrates and display some sharp contrasts to the better known portraits in the works of Xenophon’s contemporary, Plato.  Xenophon’s influence in Antiquity, the Middle Ages, and in Early Modern intellectual circles was considerable; he was a pioneer in several literary genres including the first-person military memoir (Anabasis) , the biographical novel (Education of Cyrus), and the continued history (Hellenica).  The range of his areas of expertise and the glancing charm of his down-to-earth writing style continue to fascinate and repay our study. For one example of his work in moral philosophy, he emphasized the importance of self-control, which comprises one of the cardinal virtues of Greek popular morality. This is highlighted by Xenophon in many ways.  Socrates is often said by Xenophon to have exemplified it in the very highest degree.  Cyrus displays it when he is invited to look upon the most beautiful woman in Asia, who happens to be his prisoner of war. He firmly declines this temptation; but his general Araspas stares at her endlessly, falls in lust, insults her honor, and ignites a chain of events described by Xenophon that ends in her suicide over her husband’s corpse.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Times
  2. Xenophon’s Socrates
  3. Political Philosophy
  4. Moral Philosophy
  5. Practical Treatises
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Life and Times

Xenophon was born during the early years of the Peloponnesian War, in the outlying deme of Athens called Erchia.  Located in the fertile plain known as “Mesogeia” (literally “middle earth”) and overlooked by the beautiful mountains Hymettus and Penteli, Erchia was about 20 kilometers (12 miles) from the bustling center of Athens–about a three hour walk or one hour brisk horseback ride.  His father Gryllus owned and supervised an estate whose income derived chiefly from farming.  Thus, Xenophon will have grown up surrounded by a combination of small hold-farming and urban influences.   Coming of an age in turbulent political times, Xenophon is thought to have been in Athens and personally present at the return of Alcibiades (408), the trial of the Generals, and the overthrow of the 30 Tyrants, all signal events in the rough history of Athenian civic life.

Little else is known about Xenophon’s earliest years.  From his later writings it can be safely inferred that he received a good basic education and military training as befitted a young member of the Equestrian class, that he was able to ride and hunt extensively, and that in his formative years he observed the careful work needed to keep a modest farm maintained and productive.

In 401. B.C.E at the age of 29, Xenophon was invited by his friend Proxenus to join him on a mercenary military venture to Persia, ostensibly to protect the territory of a minor satrap who was under threat.  In fact, though this was not known to Xenophon or Proxenus, the campaign was rather more ambitious than that: it was a game of thrones, nothing less than an assault on the claim of the Persian king Artaxerxes II, by his brother Cyrus the Younger.  The unfolding of this journey into foreign territory, with its adventures and mortal hazards, was a formative event in Xenophon’s life.  In the very first engagement, Cyrus was himself killed.  In a peace parley that followed, the generals of the expeditionary force were executed by treachery, leaving the army stranded, leaderless and surrounded by hostile peoples whose languages they did not speak, and winter was coming.  Xenophon eventually assumed leadership of this stranded and confused army, and led them to safety – as many as survived.  The book which Xenophon later wrote about their harrowing travels ‘up country’, Anabasis, is a hair-raising and brutally graphic soldier’s journal, of which more will be said later.

Upon his return to Greece, Xenophon continued his mercenary work under a Spartan general named Agesilaus.  He even went fighting, with Agesilaus’ “10,000” soldiers who returned from the battle of Coroneia in Persia, against a combined Athenian and Theban force.  Athens issued a decree of exile against Xenophon as a result. .  Even though it is possible that his banishment was revoked in later years, Xenophon never returned to Athens.

In gratitude for his service in this decisive Lacedaimonian victory, the Spartans gave Xenophon an estate in Elis, about 2 miles from Olympia – a region of the Peloponnese which was known for its unparalleled beauty and richness.  Here in Elis over the next 23 years, Xenophon would live a life of semi-retirement and quiet rural pursuits.  Here also he would write the bulk of his works, raise a family, and keep a distanced and reflective historical eye on the political fortunes of Athens. Nothing is known of his wife beyond her name: Philesia.  He had two sons, Gryllus and Diodorus. The Former was killed in the battle of Mantinea in 362 B.C., and Xenophon received many carefully written eulogies, a testament to his prominence in his own time.

When his adoptive city of Sparta was defeated in the Battle of Leuctra in 371 B.C., Elians drove Xenophon from his rural retreat and confiscated it.  Xenophon then moved to “flowery Corinth” where he ended his days.

2. Xenophon’s Socrates

Xenophon’s portrait of Socrates in four loosely topic-organized books is known as Memorabilia.  Any reader who comes across of this work after even a minimal exposure to the better-known Socrates of Plato’s dialogues is in for a shock.  One rare reader who encountered Xenophon’s Socrates first was John Stuart Mill, who refers to it in the context of a description of Mill’s own father:

My father's moral convictions, wholly dissevered from religion, were very much of the character of those of the Greek philosophers; and were delivered with the force and decision which characterized all that came from him. Even at the very early age at which I read with him the Memorabilia of Xenophon, I imbibed from that work and from his comments a deep respect for the character of Socrates; who stood in my mind as a model of ideal excellence: and I well remember how my father at that time impressed upon me the lesson of the "Choice of Hercules."  At a somewhat later period the lofty moral standard exhibited in the writings of Plato operated upon me with great force. (Autobiography, ch.2.)

Xenophon’s Socrates is shown in conversation with various people from a wide variety of walks of life and with quite starkly different moral characters; one of his conversation partners is a famous prostitute, another is an aspiring young politician who knows little about life, another is a son of Pericles, and yet another is a grump; the colorful list goes on.  The individual books of the “Memorabilia” each contain many different conversational vignettes and set pieces, yet they consistently show a Socrates who is above all committed to helping people improve their lives in all practical dimensions; “Socrates was so useful in all circumstances and in all ways…” Memorabilia IV.i.1).  In contrast to Plato’s Socrates, who is committed to “follow the argument wherever, like a wind, it may lead us” (Plato, Republic 394D), Xenophon’s Socrates strives always to send his conversation partners away with some nuggets of practical advice which they may put to use right away.

A brief and selective thematic summary of each book follows:

Memorabilia I:   The book begins with a defense of Socrates against the legal charges which led to his execution, in a long initial section narrated by the author in his own voice.  Socrates enjoined piety and respect for divination, which should be consulted before every momentous life-choice.  He avoided speculation about the nature of the cosmos; “…(h)is own conversation was ever of human things.  The problems he discussed were: what is godly? What is ungodly; what is just, what is unjust; what is prudence; what is madness; what is courage, what is cowardice; what is a state, what is a statesman; what is government, and what is a governor; - these, and others like them…” (Memorabilia.I.1.16).   In a conversation with Aristodemus, Socrates presents an extended ‘argument from design’ to strengthen religious faith; the concept of God here manifested is strikingly monotheistic and is also woven throughout the natural world (Memorabilia I.iv.3-19). To the charge of corrupting the youth, Xenophon writes, “…in control of his own passions and appetites he was the strictest of men” (Memorabilia II.ii.1). (The theme of self-control, both in the sense of restraint of the appetites and in that of autonomy, is strong throughout the Memorabilia.) Socrates “led men up” to self-control, motivated by his love of humanity (Memorabilia I.v, I.2.60).

Memorabilia II:  The theme of self-control is here pursued, and the famous set-piece called “Choice of Herakles” is presented (Memorabilia II.i.21-33), in a version ascribed to Prodicus.  Here, while meditating in a quiet place, the young Herakles is approached by two women who represent the lives of Virtue and Vice respectively.  Each lady tries to persuade Herakles to choose her way, with Vice offering a life of pleasures and self-indulgence, and Virtue offering the rigors of self-control which she argues will lead to true happiness.  (Oddly, the anecdote ends before Herakles chooses.)  There then follows a series of forays into the topic of human relationships as components of the good life; parents give selflessly to their children (a poignant passage describes the tireless work of mothers in particular – Memorabilia II.ii.5); friends are “more useful than any possession”, and are humorously described as being ‘hunted’ and ‘seduced by Siren song’ into one’s life, but the bottom line is that friendship is a good thing based on goodness (Memorabilia II.ii.x).  The value of work as a component of the good life is underscored by a lengthy discussion between Socrates and Aristarchus (Memorabilia II.vii), who has 14 female relatives living under his roof.  Socrates advises him to start a home textile business putting these ladies to work.  They’ll be happier, and work makes for virtue.  This scheme is represented as successful.  (The importance of toil, work, even rough manual labor, to virtue is a continuing theme for Xenophon, and a topic on which his views run counter to the aristocratic mentality of his time.)

Memorabilia III: Here Socrates offers practical advice to several different individuals concerning military leadership and what it takes to become a successful general.  The end goal, he maintains, is to make the soldiers better human beings.  Thus the type of knowledge and expertise required is rather generally found in many different pursuits; even in business (for which one conversation partner has expressed contempt), the goal is the betterment of all individuals concerned; “Don’t look down on business”, Socrates warns (Memorabilia III.iv).  (The idea that there are very general skills which lead to success in a huge variety of human endeavors is a strong theme in Xenophon’s works elsewhere as well.)   General knowledge about human nature and how to be a good leader should combine with the requisite practical knowledge about one’s chosen field, and in all fields moderation and self-control are crucially valuable traits.  Eupraxia, being a good and good-oriented practitioner, is valuable in every field, whether one is a farmer, physician, or politician (Memorabilia III.ix).  In a long set-piece, Socrates is shown visiting a beautiful and famous prostitute named Theodote, and conversing with her about friendship and how to treat one’s friends.  This highly interesting passage, unique in ancient philosophy in presenting a conversation between a working woman (of dubious social standing even!) and a well-known male philosopher, is full of humor and double-entendre but ends with Socrates inviting Theodote to come philosophize with him and his ‘girlfriends’ any time (Memorabilia III.xi).  Finally, Socrates is here something of a fitness guru, advising Epigenes to get out and get some exercise;  “…(t)here is no kind of struggle, apart from war, and no undertaking in which you will be worse off by keeping your body in better fettle” (Memorabilia III.xii.5). (An emphasis on physical fitness achieved through vigorous exercise is a very significant theme throughout Xenophon’s works.)

Memorabilia IV:  The importance of self-control to success in every field of endeavor is again underscored and argued for; talented youths and high-bred horses alike need careful training and structure in order to avoid running off the rails with maturity.  The moral quality of sophrosyne, moderation, prudence, and good habits combined, is said to be most needful in our behavior toward the gods.  For the gods are such benefactors to us that it is asked: How is it possible to be grateful enough?   Socrates offers a translation of the Delphic oracle’s inscription, “Know thyself”, as follows:  a person should “…consider what sort of a creature he is for human use and get to know his own powers” (Memorabilia IV.ii.25).  Socrates is described as having the mission of making his companions more law-abiding, more efficacious in their chosen work, more prudent or moderate, and more self-controlled.  Self-control is integral to that precious quality freedom, because no one is free who is ruled by bodily pleasure (Memorabilia IV.v).  This book ends with a beautiful encomium to Socrates spoken in what seems to be Xenophon’s own most authentic voice (Memorabilia IV.viii.11):

All who knew what manner of man Socrates was and who seek after virtue continue to this day to miss him beyond all others, as the chief of helpers in the quest for virtue.  For myself, I have described him as he was: so religious that he did nothing without counsel from the gods; so just that he did no injury, however small, to any man, but conferred the greatest benefits on all who dealt with him…To me then he seemed to be all that a truly good and happy man must be.

In addition to the Memorabilia, Xenophon also wrote a Symposium and an Apology.

Xenophon’s Symposium depicts an avowedly lighthearted group of friends attending a spontaneous dinner-party in honor of young Autolycus’ victory in an Olympic event.  Entertainment is provided by young talent dancing, singing, and performing feats of agility, while the conversation turns on each guest explaining what he values most about himself: beauty, wealth, poverty, friends, and traits of character are all offered and discussed.  Socrates presents his central attribute as the ability to be a “procurer” (essentially, a pimp); he explains that he is able to improve people and make them better, more useful, more valuable to the city, and is in this analogous to a successful pimp who is able to bring out the best in his stable of prostitutes.  In a more serious vein, Socrates explains the superior value of spiritual love over physical love, and the centrality of virtue to genuine love.  “(T)he greatest blessing that befalls the man who yearns to render his favorite a good friend is the necessity of himself making virtue his habitual practice” (Symposium viii.27).  Weirdly, the evening ends with a demonstration of smooching between two of the young musicians which is so hot that everyone rushes off home to his wife (if he has one) or professes the intention to acquire a wife as soon as possible, if he is still single.

Xenophon’s Apology begins with Socrates explaining to his friend Hermogenes why he has not been working on his defense speech: he has been hindered by his divine sign, and moreover is quite ready to die.  Socrates justifies his readiness by noting the evils of old age that he will avoid, and the blamelessness of his life.  When at trial, he defends himself from the charge of impiety by noting his regular participation in all sacrifices and other public religious rituals.  Against the charge of corrupting the youth, he notes that through the oracle at Delphi, “…Apollo answered that no man was more free than I, or more just, or more prudent” (Apology 14).  After his condemnation to death, Socrates comforts his tearful friends with a Stoic-sounding thought:  “Have you not known all along that from the moment of my birth nature had condemned me to death?” (Apology 27). Xenophon concludes in his own voice (Apology 34):

And so, in contemplating the man’s wisdom and nobility of character, I find it beyond my power to forget him or, in remembering him, to refrain from praising him.  And if among those who make virtue their aim any one has ever been brought into contact with a person more helpful than Socrates, I count that man worthy to be called most blessed.

3. Political Philosophy

Xenophon’s political philosophy is a matter of interpretation and some controversy.  Did his relationship with Sparta incline him away from Athenian democratic values?  Was his evident admiration for Persian kings indicative of an allegiance to absolute monarchy?   The main works examined in an effort to reconstruct this aspect of his thought are The Education of Cyrus (also known as Cyropaedia;) a partial biography of a Persian king building an empire, the Anabasis (account of the ill-fated Greek mercenary expedition in Persia), Hiero (a conversation about tyranny), Agesilaus (biography of a Spartan general),the Constitution of the Lacedaimonians (description of the system of laws and social practices of Sparta), and Hellenica (history of Greece from 411 – 362 B.C.E., taking up where Thucydides ends). One thing is clear and beyond controversy: Xenophon has an abiding interest in describing leadership, the constellation of qualities that enables a person to function as a leader in groups, whether military, civic, or familial.

That Xenophon admires the Spartan system and the individuals it produces is evident from both the portrait of Agesilaus and the description of the Spartan political system developed by the legendary  Lycurgus (Constitution of the Lacedaimonians).  Agesilaus is a ferocious military tactician and fighter who waged campaigns in Persia and on Greek soil.  Xenophon gives minute descriptions of the strategies Ageilaus used against the deceptive Persian general Tissaphernes, the successes of which resulted in the latter losing his head (literally).  It is thought that Xenophon was among the soldiers serving under Agesilaus at the battle of Coronea, judging from the immediacy of descriptions like this word picture of the aftermath of this particularly gruesome clash (Agesilaus II.14):

Now that the fighting was at an end, a weird spectacle met the eye, as one surveyed the scene of the conflict – the earth stained with blood, friend and foe lying dead side by side, shields smashed to pieces, spears snapped in two, daggers bared of their sheaths, some on the ground, some embedded in the bodies, some yet gripped by the hand.

What Xenophon admires most about Agesilaus though is the way his character shines through in his leadership (Agesliaus  II. 8).

(H)e took care to render his men capable of meeting all calls on their endurance; he filled their hearts with confidence that they were able to withstand any and every enemy; he inspired them all with an eager determination to out-do one another in valour; and lastly he filled all with anticipation that many good things would befall them, if only they proved good men.  For he believed that men so prepared fight with all their might; nor in point of fact did he deceive himself.

Here is that general who eats with the common soldiers, fights as hard as they do or harder, sleeps on the rudest bed in the battalion, and is tireless in care for their welfare.  Here too, we find Xenophon noting the Spartan’ general’s “love of toil” (he is philoponos, AgesilausIX.3), and the fact that he had fortified his soul “against all the assaults of lucre, of pleasure, and of fear” (Agesilaus VIII.8). Thanks to all of this and more, the Spartan remained a formidable and gnarly opponent into his eighties, and left behind him the best type of monument: the admiration of all who had known him or known of him.

The Constitution of the Lacedaimonians draws a mostly admiring portrait of the creation of distinctively Spartan social customs and military might, by a (probably mythical) genius social engineer named Lycurgus.  Like the inscription over the ant-colony entrance in T. H. White’s The Sword in the Stone, (White 1938, ch.13) “EVERYTHING NOT FORBIDDEN IS COMPULSORY,” Spartan society is legislated down to the most personal details (where men are allowed to eat supper, how much female children get fed, whether an unused horse can be borrowed, etc.) to produce an efficient warrior-making machine in which accumulations of wealth and private property were rendered impossible and the famous “equality’ which made Sparta so stable (in Xenophon’s apparent view at any rate) was forged.   Spartan soldiers were required by law to practice gymnastics while out on campaign, “…and the result is that they take more pride in themselves and have a more dignified appearance than other men” (Constitution of the Lacedaimonians  XII.5).  Extreme measures are taken with young boys, to ensure that they will develop the proper level of discipline and collectivist thinking that will produce obedient and happily equal adult citizens: they are taken from their homes at age 7 and from thenceforth live in military-like barracks, subject to discipline by any adult male who might see them transgress in any way.

Should we infer that Xenophon endorses this radical social engineering program and its collectivist political philosophy, or only that he finds it a fascinating and impressive experiment which did in fact make Sparta the most feared military force in the Greek world of its time?   Whichever interpretation we choose, it is clear at the end of the treatise that the experiment was not a lasting and unambiguous success; Xenophon writes that Spartan citizens have in fact gone over to the accumulation of individual wealth, have grown fond of wielding power over remote cities, and have lost that unanimity which was Lycurgus’ energetically-sought goal.

Did Xenophon provide an answer to the question about an Ideal Polis, a most desirable form of political organization?  Some scholars have argued that we can look for glimmerings of this in the Anabasis, where the Greek army in its struggle to reach the sea can be viewed as a “polis on the move” (Waterfield 2006, p.147).  As the shattered mercenary troops struggle to stay organized and to survive their pitiless march through the foodless deserts of Assyria and the freezing mountains of Armenia, various forms of political organization surface at various times.  While an army is most naturally understood as an oligarchy, with orders coming from a few and being followed by the many, there are also moments of democracy: soldiers hold general assemblies and agree upon resolutions which they will represent to their commanding officers.  Xenophon himself is elected by popular acclaim early in the march.  As leader, he keeps his eye on the welfare of the troops: defusing anarchy, strategically seeking out food and safety, and making the tough decisions necessary for the good of all, such as abandoning the camp followers and horses in deep mountain snow when it became clear they were a mortal liability.  During its course, Xenophon emphasizes the importance of piety and ritual which bind a polis together in homonoia or like-mindedness.  At the climactic moment when the lead troops crest a rise and spot the sea, immediately after dancing for joy and famously shouting, “Thalatta!  Thalatta!” (the sea, the sea), they build a cairn of stones to honor the gods.

The political philosophies which can be discerned in Xenophon’s largest and perhaps strangest work, The Education of Cyrus, are a matter of great controversy.  Some paradoxical aspects of the work fuel the arguments about how it should be interpreted.  Cyrus is undoubtedly a terrific leader and a daunting empire-builder, but he is seen to have some off-putting traits such as arrogance, a tendency to fear his own sensuality, and questionable judgment from time to time.  Does this mean Xenophon is implicitly criticizing the Persian model of monarchy?  Yet he takes pains, in this massive book, to show Cyrus’ uncanny ability to mobilize support and suppress resistance, and his dedication to both recognizing and rewarding nobility and virtue.  Cyrus is repeatedly seen to emphasize that the best army consists of soldiers serving of their own free will, being rewarded for their merits, and feeling respect and gratitude to their leaders.

They came not from compulsion but from their own free will, and out of gratitude.  (Cyropaedia  IV.iii.11)

Perhaps we should conclude that Xenophon’s political theory is flexible, and that the most key element of any polis revolves around the leadership skills of those in charge, alongside their self-control and devotion to the good of the whole.

4. Moral Philosophy

As seen above in the discussion of Xenophon’s Socrates and of the ideal leader, certain themes recur in Xenophon’s moral reflections. Some of the most frequently recurring ideas are:

  1.  The importance of self-control: Sophrosyne, self-control, moderation, restraint of appetite, and balance, comprises one of the cardinal virtues of Greek popular morality, and it is highlighted by Xenophon in many ways.  Socrates is often said to have exemplified it in the highest degree.  Cyrus displays it when (Cyropaedia V.i-VII.iii) he is invited to look upon the most beautiful woman in Asia, who happens to be his prisoner of war. He firmly declines this temptation; his general Araspas by contrast stares at her endlessly, falls in lust, insults her honor and ignites a chain of events that ends in her suicide over her husband’s corpse.
  2. A demanding work-ethic:  Hard work makes for virtue in several ways.  It conduces to health, it results in earned rewards, it keeps us off the streets of temptation, and builds character.   In the Oeconomicus, a treatise on household management, Xenophon tells the story of a visit paid by a Greek ambassador to Cyrus the Persian king in his royal gardens.  Cyrus astounds the Greek by stating that he himself laid out the garden plan and works in it regularly. Cyrus continues (Oeconomicus IV.24),
  3. "I never yet sat down to dinner when in sound health, without first working hard at some task of war or agriculture, or exerting myself somehow."
  4. The Greek replies, “I think you deserve your happiness, Cyrus, for you earn it by your virtue”.
  5. An ideal of service: It is impossible to miss this emphasis in Xenophon’s remembrances of Socrates, “…so useful in all circumstances and in all ways” (Memorabilia IV.i.1).  Socrates can frequently be seen offering practical help, life advice, and moral guidance to friends and total strangers.  Indeed Xenophon’s Socrates resembles an uncompensated life-coach in marked ways.  Do you have lots of ‘friends’ but suspect they just want something from you? Be more discerning and take better care of your real friends; then friendships will be on a more solid footing (advice to a prostitute; MemorabiliaII.xi).  Do you over-react to other peoples’ rudeness?  Adjust your attitude; it’s not always about you (MemorabiliaIII.xiii).  Feuding with your brother?  Study the natural world and observe that animals reared together feel a yearning for each other’s company; love between brothers is more natural than discord (Memorabilia II.iii.4).
  6. A certain utilitarianism: The best actions are the most practically beneficial for all.  In Xenophon there is nothing of the soul’s solitary winged journey toward fulfillment in transcendence.  Goodness is good for the here and now, and good for the city, or the army, or the whole farm.  Eupraxia, doing well and doing things beneficially, is of the highest value.
  7. A certain egalitarianism: Although Xenophon was no feminist, he does present the idea that the wife who is a full partner in household management contributes as much to the welfare of the estate as does her husband (Oeconomicus III.15).  Wives and husbands should be co-workers in the household (Oeconomicus III.x).  And he gives to Socrates these memorable lines about how hard it is to be a mother of small children, a passage unique in classical literature (Memorabilia II.ii.5):

The woman conceives and bears her burden in travail, risking her life, and giving of her own food; and, with much labor, having endured to the end and brought forth her child, she rears and cares for it, although she has not received any good thing, and the babe neither recognizes its benefactress nor can make its wants known to her; still she guesses what is good for it, and what it likes, and seeks to supply these things, and rears it for a long season, enduring toil day and night, nothing knowing what return she will get.

He writes admiringly of the general who eats with his men and eats the same food, of the king who works in his garden, of Socrates chatting with a prostitute, of the virtue of Panthea and her noble death (Cyropaedia VII.iii.14).  He admires the Spartan ideal of equality and laments its erosion.

5. Practical Treatises

  Xenophon’s collected works include several shorter dialogues and essays in which he (like his Socrates) provides useful and practically applicable advice on topics like choosing and training a war-horse (On Horsemanship), being a cavalry commander (The Cavalry Commander),  hunting (On Hunting), taxation (Ways and Means), and home economics (Oeconomicus).  These treatises are not flatly how-to manuals but also are infused with a distinctive world-view and a definite value-scheme.

So for example, in the treatise on horsemanship, Xenophon presents a definite equine psychology and a training ethic; the training should not be harsh, because “…nothing forced can ever be beautiful”.  The horse

must follow the indication of the aids to display of his own free will all the most beautiful and brilliant qualities (On Horsemanship XI.6).

Xenophon stresses commonalities between horses and humans.   Old saws apply equally to horses and to humans, as in the following text concerning the length of galloping sets: “In excess of the proper limit, nothing whatsoever is enjoyable, either to a horse or a man” (X.14).  It is noticeable that Xenophon does not simply say that running a horse ragged is counterproductive in training.  His point differs from this claim in two ways: he stresses again the commonality between horse and human; and he places the emphasis of the training advice upon what is pleasing (‘edu) to the horse.  Thus the horse is conceived as a partner, rather than an object, in the training project, and a partner whose willing and appreciative participation in the project is essential to its success.

So also, in the Oeconomicus, there is not simply practical instruction about running a successful small farm, but a general theme of praise for engagement, orderliness, and system that has sometimes a definite political ring, as in the following passage (Oeconomicus V.i):

For the pursuit of (farming) is in some sense a luxury as well as a means of increasing one’s estate and of training the body in all that a free man should be able to do.

Sometimes however it just sounds quaint; “What a beautiful sight is afforded by boots of all sorts arranged in rows!” (Oeconomicus VIII.19).

Thus, Xenophon’s philosophical projects were infused with a commitment to practical usefulness just as his practical treatises convey a philosophy that is still of interest today, with its emphasis on engagement in the world, on knowing who we are and how we can help.   Recall Socrates’ translation of the Delphic oracle’s inscription, “Know thyself”; a person should “…consider what sort of a creature he is for human use and get to know his own powers” (Memorabilia IV.ii.25).

6. References and Further Reading

  • Anderson, J.K., 2001, Xenophon, Bristol, U.K.: Bristol Classical.
  • Brickhouse, T., 2002, The trial and execution of Socrates: sources and controversies, New York : Oxford University Press.
  • Bruell, C., “Xenophon”, in History of Political Philosophy, ed. L. Strauss and J. Cropsey, Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1987, 89-117.
  • Buzzetti, E., 2001, “The Rhetoric of Xenophon and the Treatment of Justice in the Memorabilia”, in Interpretation 29.1: 3-35.
  • Cooper, J., 1999, "Notes on Xenophon's Socrates”, in Cooper, J., Reason and Emotion: Essays on Ancient Moral Psychology and Ethical Theory, Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press: 3-28.
  • Danzig, G. 2005, “Intra-Socratic Polemics: The Symposia of Plato and Xenophon”, in Greek, Roman, and Byzantine Studies 45: 331-357.
  • Dillery, John, 1995, Xenophon and the History of his Times, New York: Routledge.
  • Dorion, Louis-Andre, 2010, “The Straussian Exegesis of Xenophon: The Paradigmatic Case of Memorabilia IV 4”, in V. Gray. (ed.) Xenophon: Oxford Readings in Classical Studies, New York and Oxford: Oxford University Press, 283-323.
  • Fox, R.L. (ed.), 2004, The Long March: Xenophon and the Ten Thousand, New Haven: Yale University Press.
  • Gray, V., 1998, The Framing of Socrates: The Literary Interpretation of Xenophon’s Memorabilia, Stuttgart: Franz Steiner Verlag.
  • Gray, V. (ed.), 2010, Xenophon: Oxford Readings in Classical Studies, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Higgins, W. 1977, Xenophon the Athenian: the problem of the individual and the society of the polis, Albany: State University of New York Press.
  • Howland, J., 2000, “Xenophon’s Philosophical Odyssey: On the Anabasis and Plato’s Republic”, in American Political Science Review, 94.4: 875-889.
  • Johnson, D. , 2003, “Xenophon’s Socrates on Justice and the Law”, in Ancient Philosophy, 23: 255-281.
  • Judson, L. and Karasmanis, V. (edd.), 2006, Remembering Socrates, Oxford: Clarendon Press; New York : Oxford University Press
  • Nadon, C., 2001, Xenophon’s Prince: Republic and Empire in the Cyropaedia, Berkeley, CA: University of California Press.
  • O’Connor, David K., 1994, “The Erotic Self-Sufficiency of Socrates: A Reading of Xenophon’s Memorabilia”, in The Socratic Movement ed. P. A. Vander Waerdt; Ithaca NY: Cornell University Press, 150-180.
  • Pangle, T.L., 1994, “Socrates in the Context of Xenophon’s Political Writings”, in P. A. Van Der Waerdt (ed.) , The Socratic Movement, Ithaca and London: Cornell University Press, 2004: 127-150.
  • Pomeroy, S. 1994, Xenophon: Oeconomicus, A Social and Historical Commentary, Oxford: Clarendon.
  • Sandridge, Norman B., 2012, Loving Humanity, Learning, and Being Honored: The Foundations of Leadership in Xenophon’s Education of Cyrus, Washington D.C.: Center for Hellenic Studies.
  • Sandridge, Norman B., 2012: webmaster for an online commentary on Cyropaedia (an international and ongoing collaborative scholarly project) at
  • Seager, R., 2001, “Xenophon and Athenian Democratic Ideology”, in Classical Quarterly, 51.2: 385-397.
  • Strauss, L., 1948, On Tyranny, Glencoe, IL: The Free Press.
  • Tatum, J., 1989, Xenophon’s Imperial Fiction, Princeton NJ: Princeton University Press.
  • Tuplin, C. (ed.), 2004, Xenophon and his World, Stuttgart: Franz Steiner Verlag.
  • Van Der Waerdt, P. A. ed.1994, The Socratic Movement, Ithaca and London: Cornell University Press.
  • Vlastos, G, 1991, "The Evidence of Aristotle and Xenophon" In Vlastos, Socrates: Ironist and Moral Philosopher, Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press, 81-106.
  • Waterfield, R. , 2006, Xenophon’s Retreat: Greece, Persia, and the End of the Golden Age, London: Faber and Faber.
  • Waterfield, R., 2004, “Xenophon’s Socratic Mission” in Chirstopher Tuplin (ed.) Xenophon and His World, Stuttgart: Franz Steiner Verlag, 79-113.


Author Information

Eve A. Browning
University of Minnesota Duluth
U. S. A.

Mulla Sadra (c. 1572—1640)

Mulla Sadra made major contributions to Islamic metaphysics and to Shi'i theology during the Safavid period (1501-1736) in Persia. He started his career in the context of a rising culture that combined elements from the Persian past with the newly institutionalized Shi'ism and Sufi teachings. Mulla Sadra was heir to a long tradition of Islamic philosophy that from the beginning had accommodated the speculations of Greek philosophers, especially Neoplatonic philosophers, for the purpose of understanding the world, particularly in relation to the creator and the Islamic faith. Islamic philosophy originated in the rational endeavours to reconcile reason and revelation though the results did not always satisfy theologians, but ironically widened the gaps between reason and revelation.

Mulla Sadra, too, was deeply concerned about both reason and revelation, and he tried a new way of reconciliation by openly employing a synthetic methodology in which mysticism played an important part. For him and his followers, human knowledge is tenable only as long as it goes back to the indirect grasp of reality which in itself is not subject to conceptualization.  Nevertheless, Mulla Sadra was dedicated to the traditional forms of logical arguments that are based on premises evident to the mind rather than on beliefs which come from religious faith and tradition. For example, his use of Qur'anic verses and religious ideas, though it is an important part of his system, is mainly confined to a secondary or supportive position. As for mysticism, the extensive use of mystical concepts and terminology is acceptable from the point of view of those thinkers who believe that mystical inspiration, intellectual intuition, and revelation, originate in one and the same source, hence their celebration of Mulla Sadra's work as "prophetic philosophy." As a result, the scope of Mulla Sadra's work is wider than his predecessors. In addition to metaphysics, he wrote extensively on the Qur'an and the Tradition and no other major philosopher before him had been so productive in the field of religion.

While focusing on Mulla Sadra's metaphysics including his ontology, epistemology, psychology, this article also brings to light the philosopher's solutions to theological problems. Owing to these solutions, not only did Islamic philosophy manage to survive against religious and political odds, but also Shi'i theology never lost its foothold on the intellectual ground. Although the organic unity of Mulla Sadra's system rests on all the various components of his thought, his independent works on exegesis, mystical treatises, and his commentaries on preceding philosophers, are outside the scope of this article.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Synthetic methodology
  3. Ontology
    1. Primacy of Being
    2. Gradation of Being
    3. The Absolute and the Relational
  4. Epistemology
    1. Mental Being
    2. Unity of the Knower and the Known
  5. Soteriological Psychology
    1. Substantial Motion and the Soul
    2. The End of the Human Soul
  6. Major Theological Issues
    1. The Essence and the Attributes
    2. Temporal Origin of the World
    3. Bodily Resurrection
    4. Prophethood, Imamate, and Sainthood
  7. Commentaries on the Qur'an and Tradition
  8. Legacy
  9. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Philosophical Works
    2. English Translation of Primary Literature
    3. Secondary Books in European Languages

1. Biography

Muhammad ibn Ibrahim ibn Yahya al-Qawami al-Shirazi, commonly known as Mulla Sadra, was born and grew up during the golden days of the Safavid period, Iran’s first Shi'ite dynasty (c. 1501-1736). As the only son of a noble family, he received both intellectual and financial support towards a good education that started in his home town, Shiraz, in southeastern Iran. Though Shiraz had a glorious past with regard to philosophy, in Mulla Sadra's day it was not the best place for satisfying his intellectual desire.  In his quest for advanced religious and philosophical training he left Shiraz for Qazvin and then moved to Isfahan where he studied with the most eminent intellectual figures of the day, Mir Damad (d. 1631) and Shaykh Baha'̓i (d. 1576) who were also affiliated with the court of the Safavid King, Shah Abbas I (c. 1587-1629). While Mulla Sadra's philosophical character evolved in conversation and debates with Mir Damad, he owed to Shayk Baha'i his broad knowledge of exegesis (tafsir), tradition (hadith), mysticism (irfan) and jurisprudence (fiqh).  There is yet no historical evidence that he ever studied with Mir Findiriski (d. 1640/1), the other leading intellectual of the time. However, the frequency of associating the two by scholars such as Henry Corbin (d. 1978) suggests an inclination on their part towards providing a perfect picture of the philosopher's integration in the intellectual life of Isfahan with all the pivotal thinkers involved in shaping what has been called "the full flowering of prophetic philosophy" in Mulla Sadra's hands (Nasr 2006).

In 1601, upon the death of his father, Mulla Sadra returned to Shiraz. Later he related his experience during the time spent in Shiraz in a doleful and critical voice denouncing the intellectual atmosphere of the city for being hostile, suppressive, and philistine with regard to philosophy (al-Asfar I 7). He decided to leave Shiraz for a life of solitude and contemplation in Kahak, a quiet village near the city of Qom. The peace and quiet of life in Kahak gave Mulla Sadra the opportunity to start the composition of his most foundational work, al-Hikmat al-muta 'aliya fi'l-asfar al-'aqliyya al-arba (Transcendent Wisdom in the Four Journeys of the Intellect). There he also found some of his life-long students who became well-known scholars of their own time.

This period was followed by several journeys between Shiraz, Isfahan, Qom, Kashan, and most importantly, seven pilgrimages to Mecca. Apparently, this itinerant stage played an important part in his intellectual and spiritual growth that is also suggested by the "journey" metaphor in the title and divisions of al-Asfar. It was also during this period that Mulla Sadra accepted the invitation to teach at Khan School, which was built in Shiraz on the order of the new governor, Allahwirdi Khan, in Mulla Sadra's honour and for the purpose of his lectures.

Mulla Sadra had a family of six children, three sons and three daughters. All his sons became scholars and his daughters were married to three of Sadra's students whom he treated as family even prior to the marriages. We know that two of these students Muhsin Fayz Kashani  (d. 1679/80 ) and Abd al-Razzaq Lahiji (d. 1661/2 ) succeeded their father-in-law as two influential figures of their time though different to him in their philosophical orientation and working under more pressure due to the growing antagonism to philosophy and mysticism under Shah Abbas II (c. 1642-1666).

The intellectual network consisting of Mulla Sadra, his teachers and students that was later dubbed "the School of Isfahan" was formed in a unique political and religious context. Philosophers such as Mir Damad and Mulla Sadra managed to get their voices heard by their contemporaries and posterities in spite of the conservative religiosity of the newly established Shi'ite rule partly owing to the religious and political state of affairs. Since the Safavids strove to establish their identity as a Persian-Shi'ite state in contrast to the Sunni caliphate of the Turks and Arabs, they were in need of philosophy as a stronghold of knowledge that could reinforce, not to say generate, power through systematic thought. At least during the formative and golden days of the Safavid period the attacks on philosophers targeted their Sufi leanings rather than their endeavours to reconcile metaphysics with Shi'ite theology.

A prolific writer, Mulla Sadra composed a large number of treatises on ontology, epistemology, cosmology, psychology, eschatology, theology, mysticism, the Quran and the Tradition. However, many of his philosophical and theological works are repetitions of or elaborations on chapters from his magnum opus al-Hikmat al-mutaliyah fi’l-asfar al-arba‘a al-‘aqliyyah, commonly referred to as al-Asfar that is printed in nine volumes. Rather than simply holding Mulla Sadra's theses, the latter work is an encyclopaedia of different schools of Islamic philosophy and theology. With the exception of Risala-yi si asl (Treatise on the Three Principles) which is in Persian, he wrote all his works in Arabic that was the lingua franca of the Muslim world at that time. He also wrote extensive commentaries on the Qur 'an and the tradition among which respectively al-Mafatihal-ghayb (Keys to the Invisible) and his voluminous commentary on the famous collection of Shi'ite tradition, Usul al-kafi by Kulayni (d.939) are the most important.

After a pious life of dedication to acquiring and expanding philosophy and Islamic sciences, Mulla Sadra died in Basra on the way to his seventh pilgrimage to Mecca. His death was once believed to have occurred in 1640 with his body being buried in Basra. However,  modern scholarship offers new evidence, though not conclusive evidence, in support of the date of 1645 and his burial being in Najaf (Rizvi 2007 30).

2. Synthetic methodology

Mulla Sadra was determined to construct a spacious house of "transcendental philosophy" that could accommodate the apparently conflicting paths in Islamic history towards the ultimate wisdom. He was also heir to a long tradition of philosophy in Persia which had adopted the methodology of Greek philosophy and interpreted it not only in accordance with the Islamic faith, but also implicitly and partly in continuation of the antique Persian traditions. Similar to his past philosophical masters Ibn Sina (d. 1037) and Suhrawardi (d. 1191), but unaware of Ibn Rushd's (d.1198) criticism of Neoplatonism in Islamic philosophy, Mulla Sadra relied on Neoplatonic precepts which had been taken for Aristotelian ideas by preceding philosophers. In particular, he followed Suhrawardi by adopting a holistic method of philosophy in which reason is accompanied by intuition, and intellection is the realization of the quintessence of the human soul, with prophecy (nubuwwa) and sainthood (wilaya) as the noblest manifestations of it.  It is based on this holistic attitude that on the one hand, Mulla Sadra synthesizes the two main schools of Islamic philosophy, namely, the Peripatetic and Illuminationist schools, and on the other hand, bridges the gaps between philosophy, theology, and mysticism. While Mulla Sadra's philosophical methodology is rational in the sense of building his arguments on premises that consist in evident propositional beliefs, he does not reduce philosophical process to mere abstract logical reasoning. The pivotal place of intuition in his philosophical methodology is especially reflected by the influence of Ibn Arabi (d. 1240) throughout his works and by the fact that he regarded Ibn Arabi's writings as having a philosophical character with a "demonstrative force" (al-Asfar I 315). Whether we understand Mulla Sadra's use of intuition as "a higher form of reason" in the Platonic sense (Rahman 1975, 6), or as a prophetic experience that turns philosophy into "theosophy" (Nasr 1997, 57), in reality there is no actual separation between reason and intuition in Mulla Sadra's philosophy. Rather than considering ratiocination (that is, the process of exact thinking) and intuition as independent ways leading to different visions of the truth, for him they merge into one path complementing and completing each other.

Although no Islamic philosopher had ever announced reason and revelation, philosophy and prophecy in conflict with each other, in practice, several philosophical doctrines were regarded by theologians as blasphemous due to contradiction with the theological formulations of Quranic teachings. By synthesizing the findings of his predecessors and relying on his holistic methodology, Mulla Sadra addressed several controversial issues that had opened a wide gap between philosophy and theology, reason and faith. His conciliatory attitude is manifest in his writings that are replete with scriptural and theological references alongside and in harmony with the teachings of Ibn Sina, Suhrawardi, Ibn Arabi, and other Muslim thinkers.

3. Ontology

a. Primacy of Being

Although Aristotle identifies the external existence of a thing with its primary substance, he distinguishes between two questions we can ask with respect to everything: "What it is" and "whether it is (or exists)". This conceptual distinction was later extended to the extra-mental realm of contingent beings by Islamic philosophers, most insistently Ibn Sina, and following him scholastic philosophers such as Aquinas (d. 1274). For Ibn Sina, essence, or quiddity (mahiyya), is universal in the mind while particular in the external world once being is bestowed on it by the Necessary Being who is identified with the God of Abrahamic faith. Except for God who exists in His own right, every other being is composed of essence and being, hence contingent in the sense of dependence on the Necessary Being for their existence.

The distinction was taken for granted after Ibn Sina but turned into a controversial issue when philosophers in the Illuminationist school questioned the external reality of being over and above essence. Suhrawardi and following him Mir Damad argued that being was only a mental construct and the distinction between essence and being was only possible in the conceptual domain. Since then, Islamic philosophers have roughly been categorized as adherents of either the primacy of essence or the primacy of being. Influenced by his philosophy master, Mulla Sadra started as an advocate of essentialism but soon diverged towards the opposite doctrine that he made famous as "the primacy of being" (asalat-i wujud). He built on this foundation the whole of his philosophical system.

Starting with the concept of being, Mulla Sadra attributes two major characteristics to it. Firstly, being is beyond logical analysis, hence indefinable, due to its simplicity and supra-categorical status. It is self-evident and prior to any other concept in the mind. Secondly, it is a univocal concept in the sense that it has one and the same meaning in all its applications, whether we apply it to God or to any other entity. The first characteristic seems to place being as such totally outside the grasp of discursive thought. The second one leaves the philosopher with the hope that in case he finds an alternative path towards being, he will be able to bridge the ontological gap made by certain theologians between the Creator and the created.

As for the reality of being in the external world, Mulla Sadra not only follows Ibn Sina in considering being as a reality, but adheres to his other master, Ibn'Arabi in considering being as the only reality, the doctrine which is commonly referred to as "the unity of being" (wahdat al-wujud). Nevertheless, Mulla Sadra's ontological monism does not imply that essences are illusions, as it is held in radical forms of Sufism. For Mulla Sadra, though essences are not genuine in their existence, they still exist as delimitations of the Real Being that is the ground of all that exists. Using a poetic analogy, the indefinite Reality is a colorless light while essences are the colourful glasses through which the single light appears as diverse phenomena. Conceptual differentiation, without which thinking and speaking would be impossible, is owing to this semi-reality of essences. To sum up, while being is the principle of unity, essence or quiddity is the principle of difference.

Mulla Sadra has several arguments for the primacy of being and its unrivalled reality. The most comprehensive list of the arguments appears in his al-Mashair, a useful summary of his ontology, and several arguments are included in al-Asfar. For the premises of his arguments, Mulla Sadra relies on the classical understanding of essence as a universal without external effects within the mind. On this ground, the real horse can give you a ride while the universal horse in the mind is incapable of that because real particularity, external properties and real effects are owing to being and cannot be in the mind. In conclusion, being is the ground of reality, or better to say, reality itself, while essence only belongs to the conceptual realm and as Mulla Sadra put it "the term 'existent' is applied to essence only with respect to its relation to being [itself]" (al-Asfar VI 163).

b. Gradation of Being

The univocal concept of being applies to its instances in the same sense because of the unity of its reality, and conceptual differences are only due to essences. On the other hand, essences have no reality of their own. Based on these two premises, one could conclude that diversity is not real. Gradation, or modulation, of being (tashkik al-wujud) is Mulla Sadra's way to avoid this counterintuitive result and to create a system in which the monistic worldview of Sufism is reconciled with the realistic pluralism of classical philosophy and our common sense. According to this doctrine, though one simple reality, being comes in grades, in a similar way that sunlight and candlelight are the same reality of different grades. In effect, there are only differences by degrees, while essences, as concepts in the mind, reflect gradations as contrasts. As Mulla Sadra put it,

The instances of being are different in terms of intensity and weakness as such, priority and posteriority as such; nobility and baseness as such, although the universal concepts applicable to it and abstracted from it, named quiddities, are in contrast essentially, in terms of genus, species, or accidents. (al-Asfar IX 186)

Before Mulla Sadra, Suhrawardi introduced the concept of gradation into the logic of definition and considered essence as capable of applying to instances by different degrees. For example, he regarded a horse more of an animal than a fly. His ontology was based on light as the hierarchical reality of universe with realms of existence as different ranks of it. Inspired by Suhrawardi's challenge of classical philosophers such as Ibn Sina who would not allow gradation in the same essence, but in contrast to the former's belief in the ontological primacy of essence or quiddity, Mulla Sadra replaced the hierarchical light of Suhrawardi with the hierarchical being. Accordingly, Reality is one and the same thing but possessed of different degrees of intensity, which justifies diversity within unity.

The doctrine of gradation not only supports the reality of diversity, but also points out the all-encompassing simplicity of being qua being. Hence the famous dictum that is frequently repeated in Mulla Sadra's works, "the Simple Reality (basit al-haqiqa) is all things but none of those things in particular" (al-Asfar VI 111).

c. The Absolute and the Relational

Given that for Mulla Sadra reality consists in different grades of the same being, the nature of causality becomes an urgent question for him. Mulla Sadra's formulation of causality reveals the strong influence of Ibn Arabi's unity of being (wahdat al-wujud). Mulla Sadra begins with causality in the sense of existentiation (ijad) according to which contingent essences are brought into existence once their existence is necessitated by the Necessary Being. However, since in Mulla Sadra's system, essences only belong in the conceptual domain, the relationship between cause and effect cannot be explained based on the metaphysical duality of being/essence. Therefore, he finally replaces this duality by the distinction he makes between two senses of being, the independent and the relational. At the cosmic level, the only independent being is the Absolute Being, while the rest, no matter of what intensity, are only relational.

Mulla Sadra's introduction of this distinction into Islamic philosophy was inspired by the linguistic division between the meaning of "to be" in the sense of existence as a real predicate, and "to be" as a copula, the latter being nonexistent as a word in Arabic and only suggested though predication. Relational being is a "being-in-another" in the sense of being nothing other than a relation to another being. For example, in saying that "snow is white", the predicative relation that is expressed by "is" has no existence apart from "snow" and "white". Mulla Sadra regards all beings as nothing but an existential relation to the Absolute Being. For Him, "He is the Truth and the rest are His manifestations. He is the Light and the rest are the streaks of that Light…" (al-Masha’ir 450).

4. Epistemology

Mulla Sadra's epistemology is not prior to but based on his findings about the nature of reality. Though this may sound like begging the question from the perspective of modern philosophy, it is consistent with the totality of Mulla Sadra's system in which everything including knowledge itself is a form of being. It is for this reason that he studies knowledge as a subject of first philosophy, namely, the study of being qua being. He diverges from what he criticises in Ibn Sina as the negative process of abstraction (al-Asfar III 287) in favour of the positive presence of noetic or mental beings in the mind. For Mulla Sadra, knowledge is the realization of an immaterial being which corresponds to the extra-mental reality because it is the higher grade of the latter being.

Mulla Sadra's main contribution to Islamic epistemology lies in his diversion from the Aristotelian dualism of subject and object, in other words, knower and the known (̒aqil wa ma'quil). He rejected the dominant theory of knowledge as the representation of the abstracted and universal form of particular objects to the mind. This innovation, though on a different ground and based on a different foundation, is comparable to the 20th century efforts made in the area of phenomenology and existentialism to get over the epistemological scepticism resulting from Cartesian dualism.

a. Mental Being

In classical Islamic epistemology knowledge is divided into "knowledge by presence" that consists only in the immediate access of the soul to itself in the sense of self-consciousness, and "knowledge by acquisition" that originates in sense perception and provides the subject with an abstracted representation of the external objects, that is, the intelligible universal at the level of intellect. In line with the Neoplatonic trend of thought adopted by Suhrawardi, Mulla Sadra replaced representation by direct presentation (hudur). For Mulla Sadra, all knowledge is, at bottom, knowledge by presence because our knowledge of the world is a direct access to what is called mental beings.

In contrast to the Peripatetic mental form or concept as a universal produced by abstraction, mental being is an immaterial and particular mode of existence with a higher intensity than the external object corresponding to it. According to Mulla Sadra, mental being is the key to the realization of all levels of knowledge including sense perception, imagination, and intellection. Upon encounter with the external world, the soul creates mental beings in a similar manner that God creates the world of substantial forms both material and immaterial (al-Shawahid al-rububiyya 43). Thus, rather than correspondence between the external object and its represented form in the mind, for Mulla Sadra the credibility of knowledge lies in the existential unity of  different grades of the same being, one created by the soul and the other existing in the external world.

Although the human soul has the potentiality of creating modes of existence also in the absence of the matter, as in the case of miracles, for the average human soul, as long as she lives in the material world, contact with matter is necessary for activating the creative process of generating mental beings. In this respect, Mulla Sadra's epistemology should not be conflated with subjective idealism in that for him the physical being is a reality though of a lesser intensity than its counterpart in the soul.

b. Unity of the Knower and the Known

Mulla Sadra revolutionized epistemology with regard to the relationship between the knowing subject and her object based on the doctrine of the unity of the knower and the known previously held by the Neoplatonic Porphyry (d. 305) but strongly rejected by Ibn Sina.  Siding with the former, Mulla Sadra redefines the status of knowledge. Previously, mental form was defined as a psychic quality that occurs to the immaterial substance of the soul as a mere accident (̒arad), incapable of making any changes to the soul's essence. Conversely, for Mulla Sadra, knowledge that is made up of mental beings functions as a substantial form that actualizes the potential faculties of the soul. Similar to form and matter in the physical world, there is no real separation between the knower (soul or mind) and the immediately known object of it, that is, the mental being. To put it in a nutshell, knowledge is a single reality that, in its potentiality, is called "the knower" ('lim) or "the intellect" ('aqil) while in its actuality, it is "the known" (ma'lum) or the "intelligible" (ma'quil). Owing to this unity, rather than being a fixed substratum for accidental mental forms, the mind in its reality is identical to the sum of all the mental beings that are realized in it. In other words, there is no such thing as an actual mind in the absence of knowledge.

This existential unification holds at all the levels of knowledge that is confined by Mulla Sadra to sense perception, imagination, and intellection. The faculty of sense perception is a potentiality of the soul that is unified with the perceptible forms (or beings) in the occasion of contact with the sensible world. Once sensible forms (beings) are realized, a higher grade of mental beings called "the imaginal beings" are actualized in unity with the imaginative faculty of the soul. The same unification holds at the level of intellection between the intelligible forms (beings) as the actual and the intellect as potential. From this level, the human soul is capable of acquiring higher degrees of knowledge that prepares her for the final unification with the Active Intellect that is the reservoir of all knowledge, and as a result, the activator of the human mind during the creative process of knowledge formation. This epistemic elevation is at the same time the journey of the soul towards higher grades of being and spiritualization.

5. Soteriological Psychology

In the pre-modern context, one should understand the term "psychology" in the sense of inquiry into the nature and mechanism of the metaphysical soul in its relation to the body. Moreover, informed by the Islamic doctrines and inspired by mysticism, Islamic philosophers regarded the human soul as capable of elevation through acquiring knowledge and spiritual practice. Mulla Sadra's psychology is not an exception to this tradition; however, in his system, the human soul is given a more dominant role within the cosmic drama that unfolds along a salvific process of perfection.

a. Substantial Motion and the Soul

Mulla Sadra describes the soul as one simple but graded reality that in its unity includes diverse mental faculties. He also regards the soul as bodily in its origin, but spiritual in subsistence. This picture of the soul's substance is unprecedented in the philosophy before Mulla Sadra. It is built on the doctrine of substantial motion that is one of the hallmarks of transcendental philosophy. According to this doctrine, all nature, including substances and accidents, is in motion. As bodily in its origin, the soul too moves from one form to another as long as it is living in this world. The substance of the soul is an existentially graded reality in which the changes take place through the superimposition of one form over the previous one rather than one replacing the other. Therefore, the unity of the soul is maintained despite the changes and her identity is preserved.

Though starting from the Aristotelian view of the soul as the form of the body, in his psychology, Mulla Sadra departs from the former in attributing to the human soul the power of growing out of the bodily attachment. Along with the expansion of knowledge and spiritual evolvement, the soul moves up to higher grades of being. The rational human soul is actualized when we reach maturity (around the age of forty), but this is not the end. At this stage, we are actually human but potentially angels or devils. 

b. The End of the Human Soul

For Mulla Sadra, the ultimate happiness of the human souls is to join in the beatific life of the Intellects. This is in agreement not only with Aristotle's definition of happiness, but also with a Neoplatonic doctrine according to which the individual souls are only particular determinations of the universal soul that descends to the imperfect level of nature by joining the bodies. Therefore, the individual human soul, though starting as a bodily being in the world, is still invested with an otherworldly spirituality due to the noble state of the universal soul before the descent. The inherent inclination toward reunion with the Active Intellect, that is, the realm of Divine Knowledge, puts the soul back on the "arch of ascent". However, the ascent toward reunion is not guaranteed for each and every human soul since there are many phases that each soul should pass successfully in order to substantially evolve and reach up to higher ranks of being.

Mulla Sadra's delineation of the soul's journey resonates with ideas of Islamic mysticism which in turn is indebted for its theoretical formulation to Neoplatonic ideas. The title of his magnum opus, al-Asfar, together with its main divisions is a proof to the mystical attachment as the philosophical narrative unfolds in terms of the famous four journeys of the soul, namely, the quest in search of the ultimate Truth or God and the final reunion with Him. In al-Asfar, the first journey that is from the created to the Creator is devoted to the concept and reality of being. The second journey is from the Creator to the Creator through the Creator, and discusses essence. The third journey is from the Creator to the created with the Creator and is about God and His Attributes, and finally the journey from the created to the created with the Creator that is focused on the destiny of the humankind.

Furthermore, Mulla Sadra explains the afterlife of the human soul based on Ibn'Arabi's metaphysics of imagination that introduces the imaginal world (̒alam al-mithal) in between the Intellectual realm on top and the material world at the bottom. In line with Ibn'Arabi and Suhrawardi, while in contrast to Ibn Sina, Mulla Sadra believes in a bipartite reality of imagination according to which imaginative forms can exist both as subjective, or attached to the human mind, and as objective, or independent, comprising the detached domain of imagination, that is, the imaginal world. The creative imagination of the human soul, which is the source of prophecy and miracles in this world, is also the key to the bodily resurrection of the soul in the next world. While in this world only the prophets and saints are capable of bringing their imagination into life, in the next world where the material bodies are no more existent, every soul will be capable of creating her imaginal body.

The bodily resurrection of the soul should not be conflated with any forms of reincarnation which is strongly rejected by Mulla Sadra. He uses the analogy of "reflections in the mirror" (al-Mazahir al-ilahiyya, 126) to show the necessary correlation between the otherworldly body and the spiritual grade of the individual soul. Rather than transmigrating into another body, the soul creates its very own body that becomes an objective image of her intentions and deeds in the previous life. That is the reason why the lesser souls will be resurrected as animals while the noble ones will simply join in the life of Intellect with no bodies at all. Thus, the hierarchy of resurrected souls in the next world corresponds to the hierarchy of souls in this world. There is a subtle problem here concerning the nature of imagination and the "mirror-like" nature of the soul in terms of eschatology. Mulla Sadra's use of mirror imagery with respect to other-worldly bodies is his response to Suhrawardi on the same issue and draws on the endeavours of Ibn'Arabi and his commentator Dawoud al-Qaysari (d. 1350) to solve an earlier problem in Islamic philosophy (Rustom 2007).

6. Major Theological Issues

Islamic philosophy is rooted in the early endeavours of Mu'tazilite theologians who borrowed the instrument of Greek logic and terminology in order to formulate the doctrines of faith in a manner palatable for human reason. Of primary importance was proof to the existence and oneness of God, the nature and function of His Attributes, and the nature and mechanism of prophecy. Not only have different schools of theology offered divergent solutions to theological problems, but also theology has been in conflict with philosophy over several key issues. One of the novelties of Mulla Sadra's work was the systematic effort to resolve long-held conflicts between philosophers and theologians. Moreover, unlike his philosophical predecessors, he did not leave any religious doctrine to mere faith and believed in the possibility of rational explanation for all. His proof for the doctrine of bodily resurrection is a good example of this positive attitude. On the whole, Mulla Sadra does not see a chasm between philosophy and theology; rather, his theology is both the continuation and the ultimate result of his philosophical doctrines.

Mulla Sadra dismissed all the previous proofs to the existence of God as resting on wrong assumptions, or at best insufficient. He even criticised Ibn Sina's "proof of the righteous" (al-Asfar VI 13) because of its reliance on the concept rather than the reality of being. However, Mulla Sadra's proof, which he calls by the same name, shares the a priori character of Ibn Sina's proof. An a priori proof (burhan-i limmi) does not infer the existence of the Creator (cause) from the existence of any particular created thing (effect). For Mulla Sadra, the "proof of the righteous" is called by this name because it has the privilege of arguing for the existence of God through God Himself. Based on Mulla Sadra's ontology, the reality of being is necessary, and it is of different grades. The delimited and imperfect grades do not exist in their own right, but only as relations to the most perfect or Absolute Being. Therefore, the Absolute Being or God must necessarily exist. Starting from the reality of being, this argument infers the existence of God from God Himself because "the real being and the Necessary Being apply to the same thing", that is, God (al-Mabda’ wa’l-ma'ad 30).

As for the oneness of God (tawhid), that is, the first article of faith in Islam, Mulla Sadra further relies on his ontological views to argue against both the intrinsic and extrinsic plurality with respect to God. His argument is based on the transcendental inclusiveness of the Absolute Being. God as the Absolute Being is a simple reality in the sense of being without parts while including all things. As the most intense and the only independent being, God is inclusive of every form of existence while excluding only the imperfections and contingencies. Therefore, to assume another being next to God would be logically absurd. In Mulla Sadra, the theological doctrine of Divine Oneness can be identified with the mystical-philosophical doctrine of the oneness of being that is the only way in which the oneness of God can be understood without wrongly imagining it as a numerical concept.

a. The Essence and the Attributes

The simplicity of the Absolute Being in the sense of being comprehensive of all is also the key to explaining God's Attributes in relation to each other and to the Essence (dhat). Though the Attributes must be infinite in number and scope, human beings only know of a limited number of them through the Qur'an. The nature of Divine Attributes has been a subject of controversies between different theological schools. They differ over the objectivity of the Attributes in the sense of independence from God's Essence. In al-Asfar and al-Mabda’ wa’l-ma 'ad, Mulla Sadra has elaborated on several Attributes including Life, Knowledge, Will, Speech, Vision and Hearing. He tries to prove the reality of the Attributes in a way that would not defy the unity of God's Essence. He resolves this theological paradox of diversity in unity with regard to God's Essence by resorting to the simple reality of God's Being. In a similar way to the unity of the soul with the diverse psychic properties like knowledge and will, all the Attributes of God are not only unified with the Essence, but unified with each other. The corollary to this conclusion is that, in its ontological unity with the infinite and necessary Reality of God, each Attribute must be infinite and necessary. For example, God has necessary and infinite knowledge of all. According to Mulla Sadra, God knows the world through the knowledge of Himself and as his Essence includes all, he has knowledge of all without any limits. Nevertheless, the objects of divine knowledge exist at the level of Essence in a state of existential togetherness (wujud al-jam'i) with a higher grade of being than their existence as distinct essences in the created world. This is the way Mulla Sadra tried to resolve a long-held conflict between philosophy and theology regarding God's detailed knowledge of the world. In a similar fashion, Mulla Sadra redefines other Attributes of God in the context of transcendental philosophy with the hope of reconciling philosophy with theology.

b. Temporal Origin of the World

One of the earliest and harshest theological indictments of Islamic philosophy was carried out by the Ash'arite theologian, Abu Hamid Muhammad ibn Muhammad al-Ghazzali, (d. 1111) in his al-Tahafat al-falasifa (The Inconsistency of Philosophers). One of the most important faults he finds in philosophers such as Ibn Sina is the doctrine of the eternity of creation. According to this doctrine that was accepted by all Peripatetic philosophers the universe was created in eternity, which means that creation had no beginning in time. This doctrine has been criticised by theologians due to its conflict with the scriptural picture of creation, both in the Bible and the Qur'an.

Mulla Sadra takes a middle path between reason and revelation by resorting to his doctrine of substantial motion. According to Mulla Sadra, every particle of nature is in constant motion along their timeline which he regards as the fourth dimension of the bodily substance. Motion is not an accidental property given to nature over and above its substance; rather, it is essential to it and caused at the same 'time' with the creation of the bodily substance. Motion is by definition temporal, and substantial motion is the renewal of every particle of nature in time. Thus, Mulla Sadra concludes that every particle of nature is being recreated at every moment, which is the meaning of temporal origination. The world as a whole is nothing more than its parts, so the origination of the whole world in time is an absurd question.

c. Bodily Resurrection

Bodily resurrection is an article of Islamic faith that is regarded by theologians as a requisite for the fulfilment of the scriptural promises and threats regarding reward and punishment in the next world. As a theological issue, bodily resurrection has caused serious conflicts between philosophy and theology particularly following Ghazzali's criticism of Ibn Sina on this issue. According to Ibn Sina, bodily resurrection is a matter of faith that Muslims must believe in, but from a logical point of view, it is impossible.

Mulla Sadra follows Ghazzali in holding that scepticism over bodily resurrection is not acceptable from either the religious or logical point of view (al-Mazahir al-ilahiyya 125). However, he reinterprets bodily resurrection in terms of the imaginative creation of the otherworldly body by the soul. Though immaterial, the imaginal body is possessed of the three dimensions of the physical body that make it subject to a variety of feelings similar to our dream-world experiences. This will especially serve the purpose of punishment for the imperfect souls who spoiled the prospect of an intellectual/heavenly life through their carnal obsessions in the previous world. Some souls may be pardoned after serving their time in Hell by God's Grace and the intermission of angels and nobler souls. As for the others, they will stay in Hell with their imaginal bodies forever. Despite his efforts, Mulla Sadra's picture of resurrection is not in complete conformity with that of theology. Especially, his intellectual Paradise is not different to that of the classical philosophers. Great souls are not satisfied with carnal pleasures even in this world, so their reward in the next world cannot be a carnal one.

d. Prophethood, Imamate, and Sainthood

Influenced by Ibn 'Arabi's doctrine of "the Perfect Human" and its incorporation into Shi'i imamate by Sayyid Haydar Amuli  (d. 1385), Mulla Sadra explains prophethood, imamate, and sainthood as related aspects of the same reality. Prophets, Imams, and Saints are instances of the category of the Perfect Human (al-insan al-kamil) whose soul is inclusive of the three levels of creation, that is, the intellectual, the imaginal, and the sensory worlds. Mulla Sadra, regards prophethood as "exoteric guidance" (al-Shawahid al-rububiyya 492) which is necessary for the average people. Intellectual truths that are revealed to prophets through the unification of their intellect with the Angel of revelation, identical to the Active Intellect of philosophy, descend to the level of imagination and sense perception in order to be communicated to the people.

The esoteric side of prophecy is not only the innermost spiritual meaning of it, but also the purpose of creation. Although Muslims believe that Muhammad was the last prophet of God, according to Mulla Sadra, after the death of Muhammad, revelation continued in the form of inspiration that endows the Imam and Saint with the same infallibility as the Prophet.  Thus, the content of the divine communication is the same in all three, but the form is slightly different. Prophets have a clearer vision of the Angel of revelation in comparison to the Imams and Saints (al-Shawahid al-rububiyya 480).

7. Commentaries on the Qur'an and Tradition

In many cases philosophers have resorted to the Qur’an in order to reinforce their philosophical arguments. On the other hand, there is a long tradition of Qur'anic exegesis ranging from technical linguistic analysis to rational and esoteric hermeneutics (ta'wῑl) that comprises a sophisticated and independent discipline. Mulla Sadra is a special case as a philosopher who has dedicated independent treatises to Qur'anic commentaries. Moreover, there is a mutual reinforcement between his philosophy and his reading of the Qur'an in the sense that not only his approach to the Qur'an is philosophical, but also his philosophy has a Qur’anic base (Rustom 2012). Mulla Sadra does not see any conflicts between the teachings of the Qur'an and his philosophical system. Apart from several commentaries on chapters and verses from the Qur'an, Mulla Sadra also wrote about the theoretical and practical criteria of exegesis. His major theoretical work is Mafatih al-ghayb (Keys to the Invisible).

As for Mulla Sadra's work on the tradition (hadith), his monumental commentary on al-Usul al-kafi by Kulayni  is the most important. Kulayni's work is the first Shi‘i collection of Hadith and focuses on theology and jurisprudence. It has served as a textbook at the religious seminaries around the Shi'i world for centuries, and Mulla Sadra's commentary on this work has secured him a good place among the experts in Hadith scholarship.

8. Legacy

Mulla Sadra's influence on his immediate students, including his sons-in-law, Fayz Kashani and Lahiji, owed more to the mystical aspect of his works. As for his philosophical doctrines, he was only followed by the less famous among his students such as Husayn Tunikabuni  (d.1693). Especially, in the late Safavid period due to the intellectually suppressive atmosphere created by influential clerics, most prominently Muhammad Baqir Majlisi (d. 1198), philosophical and particularly mystical thoughts were antagonized by the ruling system and the clerics alike.

Nevertheless, the legacy of the philosopher was kept alive until, in the Qajar period (c. 1785-1925), a more welcoming attitude facilitated the revival of his works in the hands of his followers who worked as Sadrian scholars. In addition to editing and expounding the latter's works, as teachers they also initiated a chain of scholars that has continued until today. Among contemporary scholars and Sadrian philosophers, Muhammad Husayn Tabataba'i (d. 1981) is one of the most widely read. His books, which are based on Mulla Sadra's philosophy with some modifications, are still being taught as compendiums of Islamic philosophy at the departments of philosophy in Iran. Mulla Sadra studies particularly flourished after the Islamic Revolution of 1979. Since then, he has been widely taught both at the religious seminaries and universities with governmental funds supporting the foundation of institutes and international conferences. Among these, Sadra Islamic Philosophy Research Institute, established in 1994 in Tehran, and the World Congress on Mulla Sadra in 1999 are the best examples.

After Mulla Sadra’s death, India was the first place outside Iran to show his influence. A remarkable number of expositions and commentaries have been written on one of his marginal works called Commentary on Sharh al-Hidayah in India where it has been taught as a course book of Islamic philosophy for several centuries. Later, the Shi'i seminaries of Iraq in the city of Najaf and some influential thinkers in Pakistan also welcomed Mulla Sadra's philosophy.

Mulla Sadra was introduced into the West at the end of the nineteenth century by the German orientalist, Max Horten (d. 1945) with an emphasis on the mystical aspect of the philosopher's work. Later during 1960's and 70's, the collaboration of the French scholar Henry Corbin (d. 1978) with Toshihiko Izutsu (d.1986 ) from Japan and Seyyed Hossein Nasr (b. 1933) from Iran, led to a full-fledged introduction of Mulla Sadra into Western academia as part of a wider project of reviving "perennial wisdom". Following their work, Mulla Sadra has been translated, taught, and discussed in academic journals and circles both in Europe and North America. The contemporary generation of Mulla Sadra scholars, though approaching Mulla Sadra from different points of view, are illuminating various aspects of the philosopher's work.

9. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Philosophical Works

  • Mulla Sadra, Risala-yi si asl. Seyyed Hossein Nasr (ed.). (Tehran: Mulla Sadra Research Institute, 1381AH solar).  
  • Mulla Sadra, al-Hikmat al-muta'aliya fi asfar al-aqliya al-arba'a. 5. Muhammad Reza Muzaffar (ed.). 9 vols. (Beirut: Dar al-ihya ' al-turath al-Arabi, 1999).
  • Mulla Sadra, al-Hikmat al-'Arshiyya. Ghulam Ahani (ed.). (Isfahan: Isfahan University press, 1340 AH solar).
  • Mulla Sadra, Sharh al-Hidaya.Ahmad Shirazi (ed.). (Facsimile repr. Qom: Intishsrat-i Bidar. 1313 AH solar).
  • Mulla Sadra, al-Mabda' wa'l-ma'ad. Ahmad Hosseini Ardakani (ed.). (Tehran: Sitad-i Inqilab-i Farhangi, Markaz-i Nashr-i Danishgahi, 1983).
  • Mulla Sadra, Tafsir al-Qur’an al-karim. M. Khajavi (ed.). 7 vols. (Qom: Intisharat-i Bidar, 1988).
  • Mulla Sadra, al-Mazahir al-ilahiyya. 3. Sayyid Jalal al-Din Ashtiyani (ed.). (Qom: Office of Islamic Propagation of the Seminary of Qom, 1387 AH solar).
  • Mulla Sadra, al-Shawahid al-rububiyya. Javad Mosleh (trans.). (Tehran: Soroush Press, 2006).
  • Mulla Sadra, Majmu'a-yi rasa'il-i falsafi-yi Sadr al-muta'allihin. Hamid Naji Isfahani (ed.). (Tehran: Hikmat, 1385AH solar).
  • Mulla Sadra, al-Masha'ir.Sayyid Jalal al-Din Ashtiyani (ed.). (Qom: Office of Islamic Propagation of the Seminary of Qom, 1386 AH solar).
  • Mulla Sadra, Mafatih al-ghayb. Muhammad Khawjavi (ed.). (Beirut: Mu 'assasat al-Tarikh al-Arabi, 2002 rpt).
  • Mulla Sadra, Sharh-i Usul al-Kafi. Muhammad Khawjavi (ed.). 4 vols. (Tehran: Pizhuhishgah-i Ulūm-i Insani va Mutala'at-i Farhangi, 2004).

b. English Translation of Primary Literature

  • Mahdi Dasht Bozorgi and Fazel Asadi Amjad, Divine Manifestations: Concerning the Secrets of the Sciences of Perfection (London: ICAS Press, 2010).
  • William Chittick, The Elixir of the Gnostics (Provo: Brigham Young University Press, 2003).
  • Ibrahim Kalin, Knowledge in Later Islamic Philosophy. Mulla Sadra on Existence, Intellect, and Intuition (New York: Oxford University Press, 2010).
  • T. Kirmani, The Manner of the Creation of Actions (Tehran: SIPRIn, 2004).
  • J. Lameer, Conception and Belief in Sadr al-Din Shirazi (Tehran: Iranian Academy of Philosophy, 2005).
  • Parviz Morewedge, The Metaphysics of Mulla Sadra: The Book of Metaphysical Prehensions (New York: Society for the Study of Islamic Philosophy and Science, 1992).
  • James Morris, The Wisdom of the Throne (Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 1981).
  • Seyyed Hossein Nasr and Ibrahim Kalin, Metaphysical Penetrations: A Parallel English-Arabic Text by Mulla Sadra (Provo: Brigham Young Press, 2013).
  • Latimah Peerwani, On the Hermeneutics of the Light Verse of the Qur 'an (London: ICAS Press, 2004).
  • Colin Turner, Challenging Islamic Fundamentalism: The Three Principles of Mulla Sadra (London: Routledge, 2011).

c. Secondary Books in European Languages

  • Alparslan Açikgenç, Being and Existence in Sadra and Heidegger: A Comparative Ontology (Kuala Lumpur: International Institute of Islamic Thought and Civilization, 1993).
  • Reza Akbarian, The Fundamentals of Mulla Sadra’s Transcendent Philosophy (London: Xlibris, 2009).
  • Reza Akbarian, Islamic Philosophy: Mulla Sadra and the Quest of “Being” (London: Xlibris, 2009).
  • Cécile Bonmariage, Le Réel et les réalités: Mulla Sadra Shirazi et la structure de la réalité (Paris: Vrin, 2008).
  • Maria Massi Dakake,"Hierarchies of Knowing in Mulla Sadra's Commentary on Usul al-Kafi." Journal of Islamic Philosophy 6 (2010).
  • Mahdi Dehbashi, Transubstantial Motion and the Natural World (London: ICAS Press, 2010).
  • Max Horten, Das philosophische System von Schirázi (Strasbourg: Trübner, 1913).
  • Christian Jambet, The Act of Being: The Philosophy of Revelation in Mulla Sadra. Jeff Fort (trans.). (New York: Zone Books, 2006).
  • Christian Jambet, Mort et résurrection en islam: L’audelàselon Mulla Sadra (Paris: Albin Michel, 2008).
  • Christian Jambet, Se rendre immortel (Saint Clémentde Rivière: Fata Morgana, 2002).
  • Ibrahim Kalin, Knowledge in Later Islamic Philosophy. Mulla Sadra on Existence, Intellect, and Intuition (New York: Oxford University Press, 2010).
  • Muhammad Kamal. From Essence to Being: The Philosophy of Mulla Sadra and Martin Heidegger (London: ICAS Press, 2010).
  • Muhammad Kamal, Mulla Sadra’s Transcendent Philosophy (Aldershot: Ashgate, 2006).
  • Sayeh Meisami, Mulla Sadra (Oxford: Oneworld, 2013).
  • Mahmoud Khatami, From a Sadrean POint of View: Toward an Ontetic Elimination of the Subjectivistic Self (London: London Academy of Iranian Studies, 2004).
  • Megawati Moris, Mulla Sadra’s Doctrine of the Primacy of Existence ( KualaLumpur: ISTAC, 2003).
  • Zailan Moris, Revelation, Intellectual Intuition and Reason in the Philosophy of Mulla Sadra: An Analysis of the al-Hikmahal‘Arshiyyah (London: RoutledgeCurzon, 2002).
  • Seyyed Hossein Nasr, Sadr al-Din Shirazi and His Transcendent Theosophy. 2nd ed. (Tehran: Institute for Humanities and Cultural Studies, 1997).
  • Fazlur Rahman, The Philosophy of Mulla Sadra (Albany: State University of New York Press, 1975).
  • Sajjad Rizvi, Mulla Sadra Shirazi: His Life and Works and the Sources for Safavid Philosophy (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2007).
  • Sajjad Rizvi, Mulla Sadra and Metaphysics: Modulation of Being (London: Routledge, 2009).
  • Mohammed Rustom, "Psychology, Eschatology, Imagination, in Mulla Sadra Shirazi's Commentary on the Hadith of Awakening," Islam & Science, vol 5 (summer 2007) No 1.
  • Mohammed Rustom, The Triumph of Mercy: Philosophy and Scripture in Mulla Sadra (Albany: State University of New York Press, 2012).
  • Mahdi Ha'iri Yazdi, The Principles of Epistemology in Islamic Philosophy: Knowledge by Presence (Albany: State University of New York Press, 1992).


Author Information

Sayeh Meisami
Queen’s University School of Religion

Zhang Junmai (Carsun Chang, 1877—1969)

Zhang JunmaiZhang Junmai (Chang Chun-mai, 1877-1969), also known as Carsun Chang, was an important twentieth-century Chinese thinker and a representative of modern Chinese philosophy. Zhang’s participation in “The Debate between Metaphysicians and Scientists” of 1923, in which he defended his Neo-Confucian views against those of Chinese progressives and scientists, made a strong philosophical impression on an entire generation of Chinese intellectuals by championing the value of traditional Confucian truth claims and asserting the limits of scientific knowledge.  Subsequently, Zhang’s two-volume study of The Development of Neo-Confucian Thought (1957) and his Manifesto for the Reappraisal of Chinese Culture (1958) cemented his identification with Confucianism, and the view of Confucianism as compatible with modernity, in the English-speaking philosophical world. Despite his association with Confucianism, Zhang was deeply influenced by the work of the French thinker Henri Bergson and exponents of German Idealism, particularly Immanuel Kant and Georg Wilhelm Friedrich Hegel. Zhang is best known today, however, not for his original philosophical work but rather for his political activities during China’s Republican era (1912-1949), through which he and his “Third Force” party attempted to mediate between the polarized Nationalist and Communist factions in the Chinese political landscape, as well as his promotion of Neo-Confucian studies in the West. His personal motto was, “Do not forget philosophy because of politics, and do not forget politics because of philosophy.” Due perhaps to his acknowledgment of Western influences as well as his involvement in politics, Zhang remains one of the modern Confucian movement’s most understudied figures, especially in comparison to his contemporaries Feng Youlan and Mou Zongsan. Yet his dual participation in both philosophy and politics makes him an exemplary Confucian and an embodiment of the Neo-Confucian ideal of “the unity of knowledge and action” (zhixing heyi).

Table of Contents

  1. Early Life
  2. The Debate of 1923 and Zhang’s Moral Metaphysics
  3. Political Philosophy
  4. Confucianism and Chinese Modernity
  5. Influence and Key Interpreters
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Works
    2. Secondary Studies

1. Early Life

The man known as Zhang Junmai was born Zhang Jiasen, son of a merchant family in the Jiading district of China’s Jiangsu Province, on January 18, 1887. His early education included the memorization of the Four Books and Five Classics of traditional Confucianism.  At the age of eleven, however, his forward-thinking family sent him to study Western history and science as well as the English language, although he continued to read the work of influential Neo-Confucian thinkers such as Zhu Xi. At the age of fifteen, he passed the district-level civil service examination and earned the basic shengyuan or xiucai degree, which entitled its bearers to exemption from corvée labor and corporal punishments and granted them access to local government facilities.  After continuing his studies for a few more years, Zhang taught English in Hunan Province for two years before traveling to Tōkyō, Japan in 1906 and enrolling in Waseda University’s undergraduate program in economics and political science. Like many other Chinese intellectuals of that era, he intended to take advantage of Japan’s recent and rapid modernization by studying Western thought while remaining within an East Asian cultural context.

In Japan, Zhang befriended the constitutional monarchist Liang Qichao (1873-1929), a political reformer whose activities led to his exile in 1898.  Zhang began to publish articles in Liang’s biweekly, New Citizen (Xinmin Congbao), including translations of excerpts from John Stuart Mill’s Considerations on Representative Government. Zhang’s other activities within expatriate Chinese circles included participation in the creation of the Political Information Society (Zhengwen she), which competed with Sun Yat-sen’s United League (Tongmeng hui) for the hearts and minds of reform-minded Chinese of the period. After graduating from Waseda in 1911, he returned to China and successfully passed the entrance examination for the Hanlin Academy, a prestigious Confucian college founded in the eighth century. However, the Hanlin Academy, like other official Confucian institutions, soon fell victim to the Chinese Revolution, which swept away this and other vestiges of imperial rule in favor of a more democratic and scientifically-minded “New China.” Unable to pursue his dream of becoming a government official, Zhang returned to his ancestral home, where he was appointed chairman of the local parliament. Soon afterward, Zhang’s publication of an article critical of government policy toward Mongolia led to his proscription, and he fled to Germany to avoid repression.

In Germany, as in Japan, Zhang once more pursued academic studies, registering at the University of Berlin for preparatory coursework that would lead to enrollment in the University’s doctoral program in law and political science. World events disrupted his plans yet again when the First World War broke out in 1914. Zhang turned his attention to the ongoing conflict, publishing articles in about the European political and military situations in Chinese newspapers. In 1915, Zhang traveled to England before returning to China one year later to assume the editorship of the newspaper New Current Affairs (Shishi xinbao) and teach law at Beijing University. With the conclusion of hostilities in 1919, Zhang toured Europe in the company of Liang Qichao and other Chinese intellectuals and attempted to intervene in the transfer of sovereignty over China’s Shandong Province (the home region of Confucius) from Germany to Japan by the Peace Conference of Versailles that ended the war. Having recently produced a Chinese translation of the American president Woodrow Wilson’s “Fourteen Points,” which justified the Allies’ use of force in the name of democracy and national self-determination, Zhang was devastated and rapidly lost interest in politics, turning his attention “from social sciences to philosophy,” as he later called this crucial transition in his life.

In January 1921, Zhang met with Rudolf Eucken (1846–1926) in Jena, Germany. This encounter was perhaps one of the most important turning points in Zhang’s life. After a brief interview, Zhang decided to stay in Jena to learn philosophy under Eucken’s patronage. Studying with Eucken opened Zhang’s mind to new sets of ideas, especially those of Henri Bergson (1859-1941), and questions of life, ethics and culture gained a more important place in his thought. In 1922, Zhang collaborated with Eucken in the writing of a book in German entitled Das Lebensproblem in China und in Europa (The Problem of Human Life in China and Europe). The first half of the book, written by Eucken, was a short introduction to the history of European conceptions of life, while the second half, written by Zhang, dealt with the outlooks on life found in the work of major Chinese philosophers. Although Zhang’s treatment of Chinese thought was mainly historical in perspective, this text marks the first occasion on which he drew parallels between Confucian traditions and the philosophy of Kant. Here, Zhang argued that Confucius’ dictum that “what the superior man seeks is in himself, while what the petty man seeks is in others” (Analects 15:21) was comparable to Kant’s claim that the sources of morality are to be found within oneself. Thus, in Zhang’s view, both Confucianism and Kantianism see human morality as grounded in human nature and thus autonomous.

Despite Zhang’s immersion in philosophical studies, he remained active in politics. During his time in Germany, he met with many activists and leaders, including the social democrat Philip Scheidemann (1865–1939) and the architect of Germany’s post-war constitution, Hugo Preuss (1860–1925). These encounters with Weimar Republic intellectuals helped to form Zhang’s conceptions of socialism and exerted a lasting influence on his dual life in politics and philosophy. Both aspects of this dual life were expressed in his participation in “the Debate between Metaphysicians and Scientists” of 1923.

2. The Debate of 1923 and Zhang’s Moral Metaphysics

Having returned to China, in February 1923 Zhang gave a speech at Beijing’s Qinghua School (later Qinghua University) about the differences between science and what he called “outlooks on life” (rensheng guan). In this speech, Zhang claimed that the former is characterized by “objectivity,” “logic,” “analytic methods,” “causality,” and “uniform phenomena,” while the latter are “subjective,” “intuitive,” and “synthetic,” based on “free will.” Moreover, he defended the idea that, in her path to modernization, China should not only consider the sciences but also ought to define a new way, based on the “outlooks on life” of ancient Chinese sages. Zhang’s position drew considerable criticism from intellectuals associated with the anti-traditional May Fourth Movement, especially the famous geologist Ding Wenjiang (1887–1936). The difference of opinion between Zhang and Ding developed into a major political and philosophical event in the intellectual history of Republican China and became known as “the Debate between Metaphysicians and Scientists.” This debate played an important role in the emergence of a neo-conservative trend in modern Chinese thought by raising the questions of what place science ought to have in modern Chinese society and whether scientism and positivism ought to influence modern Chinese worldviews.  The debate also played an important role in the development of Zhang’s philosophy insofar as it prompted the first publication of Zhang’s philosophical views in Chinese.

By 1923, Zhang’s conception of himself as a “realist idealist” (weishi de weixin zhuyi)—one who refused to sacrifice empirical issues for the sake of his deeply-held ideals—was fully established. Because of Zhang’s attraction to the thought of Bergson and Eucken, he was often criticized as an “anti-rationalist” (fan lixing zhuyi zhe). What his critics appear to have had in mind was not an opposition to reason on Zhang’s part, but rather his concern to avoid the over-use of the “process of abstraction” (chouxiang licheng). On Zhang’s view, when considering abstractions such as “Humanity” or “Nature,” one should always keep in mind that they are real and in front of us. Instead of building abstract systems and concepts, Zhang wanted to construct a philosophy that would embrace the reality and the fullness of the universe.

Zhang founded his “realist idealist” philosophy on the basis of a classically dualistic conception of the world. On the one hand, there is matter (wuzhi or wu); on the other hand, there is spirit (jingshen) or mind (xin). Zhang rejected monistic conceptions of the world as incoherent, going so far as to translate the English philosopher C. E. M. Joad’s Mind and Matter, which advocated the same position, in 1926. Zhang’s dichotomy between mind and matter is a structural division in his philosophy, which generates a series of opposing notions: matter is outside (wai) of the self and is fixed (ding), while mind or spirit is always inside (nei) the self and in motion (dong). The material world of nature is governed by causality, while the spiritual world of humanity is conducted by free will (ziyou yizhi). In later years, when discussing the relation between liberty (ziyou) and power (quanli) in political philosophy, Zhang categorized the former as belonging to the realm of spirit and the latter as relative to matter. His division between science and “outlooks on life” thus is an extension of these binary oppositions that are basic to his thought.

Zhang regarded science (kexue) as a plural signifier and subdivided it into two types: “material sciences” (wuzhi kexue) and “spiritual sciences” (jingshen kexue). This opposition was based on the German distinction between “natural sciences” (Naturwissenschaften or Exactewissenchaften) and “spiritual sciences” (Geistwissenchaften). While his opponents advocated science as one universal epistemology based on specific methodology, Zhang argued that one should consider sciences according to their objects, which could be any of three types: “inert” (si zhi wu), “alive” (huo zhi wu), or “alive and thinking” (youhuo yousi zhi wu). Incapable of moving by themselves, inert objects are bound to follow the rules of causality. Their movements can be explained by natural laws, and it is the purpose of material sciences to discover and analyze these laws. For instance, astronomy aims at explaining how planets gravitate around the sun. On Zhang’s account, physics and astronomy are the most archetypal material sciences.

Although plants and animals lack “mind” in Zhang’s sense, they are alive nonetheless, so for Zhang, their analysis raises further issues.  Unlike inert objects, plants and animals can move on their own, so despite the fact that causality applies to them, it doesn’t explain everything. But Zhang insisted that the presence of life in itself couldn’t be questioned by science. Following the ideas of the German vitalist Hans Driesch (1867–1941)—who was at that time visiting in China, where Zhang served as his translator—Zhang seems to believe that there is an entelechy, a driving principle that directs life and its development without being part of the soul or the organism, the existence of which precludes questioning its manifestation. To Zhang, the very foundations of life were completely impossible to analyze. Therefore, biology was not literally “the science of what is alive” but only the science that analyzes the material structure and development of living animals and plants

As for what Zhang called “spiritual sciences”—by which he meant something like social sciences—these moved beyond the realm of matter and were capable of analyzing humanity itself. Yet all the natural laws that could be found in those sciences were always linked to a material aspect of life. For instance, Zhang accepted that there were laws of development in economy; economy and society were at some point to follow specific patterns. But he insisted that these laws could only be found because there are material and fixed data to analyze. Economics, for example, deals with manufactured goods. On Zhang’s account, spiritual sciences could discover and analyze laws of nature only if their object was somehow linked to something material. Even if there are laws that condition the development of social phenomena, human beings still can use their minds and free will to modify the situation. For that reason, social laws or historical patterns can only be sought in the past.  Following Bergson, Zhang noted that the human spirit is in perpetual transformation (xin zhi wanbian): it is impossible to divide thought into fixed mental states, as our minds are always on the move (dong). Having no place to settle, no analysis can be made. Therefore, for Zhang, there cannot be any real psychology, but only physiology, a study of the relation between stimuli and the mind. According to Zhang, science cannot predict the future of humanity, which is why he rejected Marxism.

In contrast to such “sciences,” Zhang outlined his understanding of “outlooks on life” as a coherent alternative to claiming that everything could be understood and controlled by Science. In her fight for a new culture (xin wenhua), China was to cast away naturalism and positivism, and develop a new “outlook on life,” based on both Western modernity and the teachings of the ancient Chinese sages, that did not exclude or condemn metaphysics. Zhang even claimed that the introduction of Bergson’s and Eucken’s philosophies to China could give birth to “Neo-Song [Dynasty] Learning” (xin songxue 新宋學), just as the introduction of Buddhism to China had permitted the emergence of the original Neo-Confucianism of the Song dynasty (songxue).

In Eucken’s philosophy, humanity is a being at the frontier of matter and spirit, and is in a perpetual struggle to achieve a spiritual life that can overcome his material nature. By promoting metaphysics, Zhang wished to foster human spiritual life and dismiss a scientistic conception of the world that would bind human beings in the web of material causality.   Borrowing from Eucken’s Die Lebenschauungen der grossen denker (Outlooks on Life of the Great Thinkers, 1890), Zhang defined “outlook on life” as follows:

The observations, holds, hopes, and demands that I have toward the persons and the objects external to myself—that’s what I call an outlook on life. (Zhang 1981, p. 935)

Outlooks on life are not under the control of sciences. They find their source in the self (wo). Considering that “toward the world, man’s life is inner as spirit and outer as matter” (ibid.), outlooks on life are in fact what link our spiritual life with the material world. Even if people of the past can be models to follow (Zhang 1981, p. 913), everyone ought to develop his own outlook on life according to what his heart-mind (xin) tells him. That is what Zhang called the mandate of moral conscience (liangxin zhi ming). For Zhang as for other Confucians, the heart-mind is the center of the self; every moral thought and volition is generated from it. Having three principal functions, knowledge (zhi 智), emotions (qing 情) and will (zhi 志), it is what makes us human. In total opposition to the view defended by Hu Shi (1891-1962) at that time, Zhang argued that the difference between humans and animals is qualitative, not quantitative. The use of such concepts and terminology shows how deep the influence of Mencius’ and Wang Yangming’s moral thought on Zhang was. As a thinker who was steeped in Confucian tradition, Zhang considered human beings to be good by nature and wanted to promote Neo-Confucian metaphysics as a means to cultivate oneself (xiushen).

Finally, a word should be said about Zhang’s debt to Kant, which was the result of his lifelong infatuation with this eighteenth-century German thinker. Zhang’s epistemology was mainly drawn from Kant’s Critique of Pure Reason (1781); he considered Kant to be the man who “had succeeded in harmonizing British empiricism and German rationalism” (Zhang 1981, p. 949). For Zhang, knowledge is the result of an encounter between material sense information and the innate categories of the mind. Human beings have innate categories or “concepts of reason” (lixing zhi gainian) that enable them to understand, classify, and aggregate all of their sensations (ganjue). It is these concepts of reason that link sensations to meanings (yiyi). Later, Zhang suggested that knowledge, built up from the encounter of sensations and concepts of reason, is always internal to one’s mind. For instance, in 1957, he wrote that the Song dynasty Confucian thinker Ch’eng I’s statement ”Human nature is reason” [(xing ji li ye], “means nothing other than the rationalist doctrine that forms of thought exist a priori in the mind” (Chang 1957, p. 35). For Zhang, the key philosophical question was that of the relationship between a mind able of knowing (zhizhi zhi xin) and the myriad things (wanwu zhi you) or phenomenal universe, through which knowledge of all that exists, materially and spiritually, could be integrated. Assuming that the principle of mind (xin li) is universal, Zhang anticipated that the development of thought ought to be somehow similar in every culture. This argument would form the basis of his claim that a genuine Chinese modernity was possible.

3. Political Philosophy

Despite Zhang’s leap “from social sciences to philosophy,” he did not abandon political life.    On the contrary, he participated in the drafting of a new Chinese constitution and wrote

On the Meaning of Constitutions (1921).  He struggled to introduce socialism in China. Very much taken with the newly-established Weimar Republic in Germany, Zhang wished to establish a very similar political system in China. In 1923, he opened a “Political Institute” in the suburbs of Shanghai, the aim of which was to form a new political elite that would be able to shape the nation’s affairs in future years. Under its auspices, Chinese students were exposed to political philosophy, economics, sociology, and international relations as well as Zhang’s critiques of both the Chinese Communist Party and the Guomindang (Kuomintang, KMT) or Chinese Nationalist Party, which contended against each other for political and later military supremacy throughout the 1920s, ’30s, and ’40s. After the KMT occupation of Shanghai in 1927, Zhang was forced to close the Institute and ventured into underground political activities. With Li Huang (1895—1991), a leader of the Chinese Youth Party (Zhongguo qingnian dang), he illegally published a journal, The New Way (Xinlu), in which he proclaimed his political values:

 [D]emocratic government, opposition to both one-class and one-party dictatorships, freedom of speech and association, opposition to the denial of these basic human rights under the pretext of party or military rule, the opposition to party control of education, of judicial affairs, of civil servants, and the use of the army for personal or party purposes. (Chi, p. 141)

These points can be regarded as the key ideas of Zhang’s political thought at the time. In opposition to nationalist and communist conceptions of the political power in China, Zhang totally forbade the political parties to indoctrinate their members, to use military force or to practice dictatorial politics—all of which may have prevented Zhang’s own political parties from ever succeeding in the brutal political climate of China during the 1930s. Frustrated by chronic repression at the hands of the KMT, Zhang fled China once again and returned to Germany, where he obtained a position as Professor of Chinese Philosophy at the University of Jena through the assistance of Eucken’s former students. Eventually, he returned to China just before Japanese invasion of Manchuria in September 1931. In this politically-charged and highly unstable climate, Zhang assumed professorial duties in philosophy at Yanjing University in Beijing, teaching mostly about Hegel, before being ejected from his position as a result of his critical stance vis-a-vis the KMT government. Siding with the warlord Chen Jitang, the de facto ruler of Guangdong Province, Zhang again found work as a professor of philosophy, this time teaching Neo-Confucianism—first at Sun Yat-sen University and later at his own Learning Ocean Academy (Xuehai Shuyuan).

At this institution, which blended traditional Confucian education with what Zhang saw as the best of Western learning (humanities, social sciences, and physical education), he was able to put into practice what he had defended during the debate of 1923: an education that would place equal and shared emphasis on the humanities (especially metaphysics), the arts, sports, and of course the sciences. In 1939, Zhang opened another such school: the Institute of National Culture (Minzu Wenhua Xueyuan), the guiding documents of which stated:

The objectives of this academy are as follows: one, to achieve one’s personality; two, to temper and foster intelligence in order to contribute to the world scholarship; three, to deploy these activities, in which moral and knowledge are one, to participate grandly in the ordering of the world (or statecraft). (Zhang 1981, p. 1435)

To participate in the world, either as politicians or as scholars, students were first to develop their personality. For Zhang, such psychological development, along with physical ability and intellectual knowledge, were all necessary to become a full human being. Self-cultivation through education, in turn, was key to the development of Chinese democracy, which was Zhang’s primary political commitment. In his political philosophy, there is a very strong bond between the people and the idea of the State. Democracy should not be implemented from above, but rather it should arise from the heart-minds of citizens. Influenced by Confucian ethics, Zhang appears to have viewed democracy through the prism of the canonical Confucian text known as the Daxue (Great Learning), which states:

To bring the world at peace, one should first govern one’s State; to govern one’s State, one should first order one’s family; to order one’s family, one should first cultivate oneself.

Zhang believed that the Chinese people would permit the emergence of democracy as the result of their own self-cultivation. For him, the State was no longer understood as a simple technical term of political science. It was the realization of the spirit of a people, founded on the basis of law and morality. Borrowing the Hegelian idea that “State is the realization of the Spirit [or Reason]” (guojia zhe jingshen zhi shixian ye), Zhang linked the question of the State with a certain humanism and a valorization of Chinese culture. The emergence of a new political system was to be the result of a New Culture (xin wenhua), from which would emerge a new outlook on life. Unfortunately, Zhang’s academies never stayed open very long. The Ocean Learning Academy was active for only two years, while the Institute of National Culture was closed in 1942, after three years of operation.

4. Confucianism and Chinese Modernity

As was the case with Zhang’s moral metaphysics and political philosophy, so also in his understanding of culture did Zhang cleave closely to his Confucian heritage. His philosophy of culture upheld a certain conservatism, according to which both Chinese cultural unity and Chinese social development could proceed organically from a shared basis in Neo-Confucian thought. In The Chinese Culture of Tomorrow (1936), which can be regarded as a response to Liang Shuming’s Eastern and Western Cultures and Their Philosophies (1921), Zhang defended this view:

Spiritual freedom [jingshen ziyou] is the foundation of a national culture [minzu wenhua] and therefore it should be the central principle to direct the politics, the sciences and the arts of China from now on. (Zhang 2006b, p. 1)

Zhang argued that a culture is a spiritual entity that is created by, and evolved through, the free contributions of its people—not a static expression of an ahistorical will, as Liang claimed. The nation is in fact the group of persons that build a cultural unity and live together within it. The influence of the Western philosophers of history Oswald Spengler (1880-1936) and Arnold Toynbee (1889-1975) can be seen in Zhang’s view. Zhang understood European modernity to be the result of a threefold historical process, which consisted of (1) religious reform (zongjiao gaige), (2) scientific development (kexue fazhan), and (3) the emergence of democratic government (minzhu zhengzhi). The challenge for China, therefore, lay not with importing European modernity, but rather with completing its own historical process of development in evolutionary terms specific to Chinese culture.

Like many Chinese intellectuals of the early twentieth century, Zhang advocated the need for a “New Culture”; like his rival Liang, Zhang believed that Chinese culture would become the global culture of the future. However, Zhang believed that this “New Culture” would develop only in response to the intellectual challenge represented by the West, just as Neo-Confucianism had developed in response to the intellectual challenge represented by the introduction of Buddhism from India—an historical event to which Zhang repeatedly referred as a positive precedent for China’s ability to adapt to foreign systems of thought. As “the culture of harmony,” Chinese culture would find the middle way (zhezhong) between all global philosophical and cultural trends—but only if she initiated the first step in the threefold historical process by rediscovering and reviving the “Chinese national spirit” (Zhonghua minzu jingshen), which Zhang identified with Neo-Confucianism. After China revived the quintessence of her past culture—that is, Neo-Confucianism as interpreted by Zhang—she would be able to formulate a new outlook on life, which in turn would give birth to a new culture. From this new culture, a new political system and a new economic organization soon would follow.

However, unlike many Chinese intellectuals of the era who defended a racial conception of the nation, Zhang had no interest in the question of blood lineage. As he pointed out in The Chinese Culture of Tomorrow (1936) and The Way to Establish the State (1938), one could not find any racial unity in China; since various “barbarian” invasions had produced a “blood mix” in the population, the blood of the Han ethnic majority was no longer “pure.”  Constructing a blood-based nationalism would be irrelevant and self-destructive, but constructing a culture-based nationalism was another matter:

I won’t dare say that in History there was such a thing as a pure blood Han nation, however I can attest that there is a Han Culture, which embodies the language spoken, the characters used, the calendar, the customs, the rites and so on. (Zhang 2006d, p. 9)

Zhang’s activity as a non-aligned political thinker was curtailed by the end of cooperation between the KMT and the Chinese Communist Party in 1941, and he was placed under house arrest because of his opposition to KMT policies. In 1944, he was released and traveled to the United States, where he attended the founding meeting of the United Stations. While in the United States, Zhang renewed his interest in constitutionalism and spent much of his time studying the American Constitution. After returning to China in 1946, he began to argue that a conception of human rights, or at least its seeds, could be found in the Chinese intellectual tradition, especially in the thought of Mencius. His work became the basis of the Constitution of the Republic of China adopted in 1946, which is still in effect in Taiwan today. The implementation of the Constitution failed to resolve China’s ongoing civil war, however, and with the triumph of Communist forces in 1949, Zhang fled to a life of exile in Hong Kong.

In Hong Kong, Zhang produced The Third Force in China and initiated the modern Chinese discourse on democracy’s roots in Chinese tradition. Having identified elements of democratic sensibilities in ancient Chinese texts, Zhang held out hope that the establishment of democracy in China still was possible despite the victory of Communism on the mainland.  He even suggested that the Enlightenment and the development of democratic ideas in the West during the eighteenth century were made possible due to the introduction of Confucian thought to Europe by Jesuit missionaries a century earlier. Thus, in Zhang’s view, Confucius and Mencius were the hidden sources of the West’s Enlightenment. Moreover, Zhang regarded Marxism as being in total opposition to the “Chinese outlook on life,” and anticipated the eventual decline of Communist ideology in China. In 1957 and 1962, he issued in English the two volumes of his magnum opus on the intellectual history of China, The Development of Neo-Confucian Thought, which opens with the following sentence:

China is the land of Confucianism. (Chang 1957, p.15)

In Zhang’s biographically-focused and comparatively-oriented account of Neo-Confucianism, rooted in his conception of “outlooks on life” in the East and the West, he criticized Communism as an alien system of thought that would not take root in Chinese culture, which he believed was characterized by Confucianism despite the influence of other traditions. Identifying himself as a twentieth century “Neo-Confucian,” Zhang continued to advocate what he saw as a genuine Chinese Confucian modernity until his death at age eighty-two in the United States in 1969, which also marked the height of the Communists’ “Cultural Revolution” campaign against Confucianism and other emblems of Chinese tradition.

5. Influence and Key Interpreters

Zhang’s involvement in the production of A Manifesto on the Reappraisal of Chinese Culture (1958), a document that aimed to promote an appreciation of Chinese culture among Western intellectuals, marks him as one of the key influences on the modern “New Confucian” movement, which seeks to promote Confucianism as a spiritual tradition that is fully compatible with democracy, science, and other aspects of modernity. Zhang’s participation in this movement probably stands as his foremost legacy in the world of contemporary Chinese philosophy.

Despite Zhang’s stature as a founder of New Confucianism and a promoter of Neo-Confucian studies in the West, he is little studied today, especially by Western scholars. Most Western research on Zhang’s thought has focused on his political philosophy and activism—an approach exemplified by the work of Roger B. Jeans (1997). Studies that depart from this rule include those of Umberto Bresciani (2001) and Edmund S.K. Fung (2003). German scholars have taken a particular interest in the ways in which Zhang’s work might apply to resolving modern problems, such as the deterioration of social relationships and the spiritual vacuum perceived in contemporary societies. Werner Messner (1994) has devoted attention to the tension between the process of modernization and the will to find a specific way (Sonderweg) for China in the thought of modern Chinese philosophers, especially Zhang.

Unsurprisingly, interest in Zhang’s work has been greater in the Chinese-speaking world, especially outside of mainland China. Zhang’s friends and associates produced much of the early scholarship on his thought. Xue Huayuan’s 1993 study of Zhang’s political activity ranks with Jeans’ work among the major research on Zhang produced to date. Within mainland China, for many years Zhang’s thought was proscribed because his idealist views and “bourgeois” background. Even after studies of Zhang by mainland Chinese scholars began to appear in the 1990s, many—such as those by Lü Xichen and Chen Ying (1996)—were harshly critical of his shortcomings as seen from a Marxist perspective. More recently, Zheng Dahua (1997, 1999) has produced more sympathetic scholarship on Zhang’s thought, while Chai Wenhua (2004) has explored Zhang’s conception of culture in particular. Most recently, Weng Hekai’s work (2010) focuses on Zhang’s contributions to the question of Chinese nation-building, especially the influence of John Stuart Mill to Zhang’s thinking about this issue. As interest in Zhang’s special concerns, such as Chinese cultural unity, constitutionalism, and an authentically Chinese modernity, intensifies in contemporary China, interest in Zhang’s legacy is sure to increase there and elsewhere.

6. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Works

  • Chang, Carsun.  The Third Force in China, New York: Bookman Associates, 1952.
  • Chang, Carsun. The Development of Neo-Confucian thought. 2 vols. New York: Bookman Associates, 1957-1962.
  • Chang, Carsun. Wang Yang-ming: Idealist Philosopher of Sixteenth-Century China. Jamaica, NY: St.  John’s University Press, 1962.
  • Chang, Carsun, and Rudolf Eucken. Das Lebensproblem in China und in Europa, Leipzig: Quelle & Meyer, 1922.
  • Chang, Carsun, and Kalidas Nag.  China and Gandhian India. Calcutta: The Book Company, 1956.
  • Zhang, Junmai. Guoxian yi (1921). In Xian Zheng zhi dao (Beijing: Qianghua daxue chubanshe, 2006a).
  • Zhang, Junmai. Minzu fuxing de xueshu jichu (1935). Beijing: Zhongguo renmin daxue chubanshe, 2006b.
  • Zhang, Junmai.  Mingri zhi Zhongguo wenhua (1936). Beijing: Zhongguo renmin daxue chubanshe, 2006c.
  • Zhang, Junmai. Li guo zhi dao (1938). In Xian Zheng zhi dao (Beijing: Qianghua daxue chubanshe, 2006d).
  • Zhang, Junmai. Yili xue shi jiang gangyao (1955). Beijing: Zhongguo renmin daxue chubanshe, 2006.
  • Zhang, Junmai. Bijiao Zhong Ri Yangming xue. Taibei: Taiwan shangwu yinshu guan, 1955.
  • Zhang, Junmai. Bianzheng weiwu zhuyi bolun. Hong Kong: Youlian chubanshe, 1958.
  • Zhang, Junmai. Zhongguo zhuanzhi junzhu zhengzhi pingyi. Taibei: Hongwen guan chubanshe, 1986.
  • Zhang, Junmai. Rujia zhexue zhi fuxing. Beijing: Zhongguo renmin daxue chubanshe, 2006.
  • Zhang, Junmai, and Wenxi Cheng. Zhong Xi Yin zhexue wenji. 2 vols. Taibei: Taiwan xuesheng shuju, 1970.
  • Zhang, Junmai, and Huayuan Xue. Yijiusijiu nian yihou Zhang Junmai yanlun ji. Taibei : Daoxiang chubanshe, 1989.

b. Secondary Studies

  • Bresciani, Umberto. Reinventing Confucianism: The New Confucian Movement. Taipei: Taipei Ricci Institute for Chinese Studies, 2001.
  • Chai, Wenhua. Xiandai xin ruxue wenhua guan yanjiu. Beijing: Xinhua shudian, 2004.
  • Chen, Huifen. “Minzu xing, Shidai xing, Zizhu xing: 1930 niandai Zhang Junmai de wenhua jueze.” Taiwan shida lishi xuebao 28 (June 2000): 109–158.
  • Chen, Xianchu. Jingshen ziyou yu minzu fuxing – Zhang Junmai sixiang zonglun. Changsha: Hunan Jiaoyu chubanshe, 1999.
  • Chi, Wen-shun. Ideological conflicts in Modern China: Democracy and Authoritarianism.  New Brunswick: Transaction Books, 1986.
  • Fang, Shiduo, ed. Zhang Junmai zhuanji ziliao. 8 vols. Taibei: Tianyi, 1979-1981.
  • Frohlich, Thomas. Staatsdenken im China der Republikzeit (1912–1949): Die Instrumentalisierung philosophischer Ideen bei chinesischen Intellektuellen. Frankfurt: Campus Verlag, 2000.
  • Fung, Edmund S.K. “New Confucianism and Chinese Democratization: The Thought and Predicament of Zhang Junmai.” Twentieth Century China 28/2 (April 2003): 41-71.
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Author Information

Joseph Ciaudo
Institute of Eastern Languages and Civilizations

Francis Hutcheson (1694—1745)

Francis HutchesonFrancis Hutcheson was an eighteenth-century Scottish philosopher whose meticulous writings and activities influenced life in Scotland, Great Britain, Europe, and even the newly formed North American colonies. For historians and political scientists, the emphasis has been on his theories of liberalism and political rights; for philosophers and psychologists, Hutcheson’s importance comes from his theories of human nature, which include an account of an innate care and concern for others and of the internal senses (including the moral sense). The latter were pivotal to the Scottish Enlightenment’s empirical aesthetics, and all of Hutcheson’s theories were important to moral sentimentalism. One cannot properly study the works of Adam Smith, Hutcheson’s most famous student, or David Hume’s moral and political theories, without first understanding Hutcheson’s contributions and influence.

Popular and well-read in his day, Hutcheson’s writings seem to be enjoying resurgence specifically among libertarians, contemporary moral psychologists and philosophers. The latter are taking another and more in-depth look at Hutcheson and the rest of the sentimentalists because present-day empirical studies seem to support many of their claims about human nature. This is not surprising because the philosophical theories of the Scottish Enlightenment were based on human observations and experiences, much of which would be considered psychology today.

As part of his attempt to defend Shaftesbury against the attacks of Bernard Mandeville, Hutcheson's writings concentrate on human nature. Hutcheson also promoted a natural benevolence against the egoism of Thomas Hobbes and against the reward/punishment view of Samuel Pufendorf by appealing to our own experiences of ourselves and others.

What follows is an overview of Hutcheson’s life, works and influence, with special attention paid to his writings on aesthetics, morality, and the importance of the internal senses of beauty, harmony, and the moral sense.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Internal Senses
  3. Moral Sense Faculty
    1. Operations of moral sense faculty
    2. Sense vs. Reason
    3. Basis of Moral Determinations
  4. Benevolence: Response to Hobbes and Pufendorf
  5. Influences on Hume and Smith
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Works by Hutcheson
      1. Collected Works and Correspondence
    2. Secondary Readings

1. Life

Francis Hutcheson was born to Scottish parents on August 8, 1694 in Ireland. Though remembered primarily as a philosopher, he was also a Presbyterian minister, as were his father and grandfather before him. After he attended the University of Glasgow in Scotland in 1711 he returned to Dublin in 1716. Rather than taking a ministry position he was asked to start an academy in Dublin, and it was here that he wrote his most influential works. At this time he also married Mary Wilson and had one son, Francis. Eventually he was appointed professor and chair of Moral Philosophy at the University of Glasgow in 1729 following the death of his mentor and teacher, Gershom Carmichael.

Hutcheson was a popular lecturer perhaps because he was the first professor to use English in lectures rather than the commonly used Latin and also, possibly influenced by his preaching experience, was more animated than was typical of an eighteenth-century academic. Throughout his career he retained a commitment to the liberal arts as his thoughts and theories were always connected to the ancient traditions, especially those of Aristotle and Cicero. His writings were respected even before his Glasgow position and this reputation continued throughout his lifetime. His most influential pieces, first published in Dublin anonymously, were An Inquiry into the Original of Our Ideas of Beauty and Virtue (1725) and An Essay on the Nature and Conduct of the Passions and Affections, with Illustrations of the Moral Sense (1728). Hutcheson’s moral theory was influenced most by Lord Shaftesbury, while his aesthetics were in many ways influenced by and a response to John Locke’s primary and secondary qualities. Those who read and were influenced by Hutcheson’s theories included David Hume and Adam Smith, his student at Glasgow, while Thomas Reid and Immanuel Kant both cited Hutcheson in their writings.

Francis Hutcheson died in 1745 after 16 years at Glasgow while on a visit to Ireland, where he is buried.  After his death, his son and namesake published another edition of Hutcheson’s Illustrations on the Moral Sense in 1746 and in 1755, A System of Moral Philosophy, a text written specifically for college students.

2. Internal Senses

Though Shaftesbury could be called the father of modern aesthetics, Hutcheson’s thorough treatment of the internal senses, especially of beauty, grandeur, harmony, novelty, order and design in the Inquiry, is what specifically moved the focus of study from rational explanations to the sensations. For Hutcheson the perception of beauty does depend on the external sense of sight; however, the internal sense of beauty operates as an internal or reflex sense. The same is the case with hearing: hearing music does not necessarily give the perception of harmony as it is distinct from the hearing (Inquiry I. I. X). Yet, the internal senses are senses because like the external senses they are immediate perceptions not needing knowledge of cause or advantage to receive the idea of beauty. Both the external and internal senses are characterized by a passive and involuntary nature, and the internal senses are a source of pleasure and pain. With a nod to Locke’s primary and secondary qualities (Inquiry I, 1 7), Hutcheson described perception specifically of beauty and harmony in terms of simple and complex ideas. Without the internal sense of beauty there is no perception of it: “This superior power of perception is justly called a sense, because of its affinity to the other senses in this, that the pleasure does not arise from any knowledge of principles, proportions, causes, or of the usefulness of the object; but strikes us at first with the idea of beauty: nor does the most accurate knowledge increase this pleasure of beauty, however it may super-add a distinct rational pleasure from prospects of advantage, or from the increase of knowledge” (Inquiry I, 1, 8).

The perception of beauty though excited by an object is not possible without this internal sense of beauty. There is a specific type of absolute beauty and there are figures that excite this idea of beauty. We experience this when recognizing what Hutcheson calls “uniformity amidst variety” (Inquiry, I, 2, 3). This happens with both mathematical and natural objects, which although multifaceted and complex, are perceived with a distinct uniformity. The proportions of an animal or human figure can also excite and touch the internal sense as absolute beauty. Imitative beauty, on the other hand, is perceived in comparison to something else or as an imitation in art, poetry, or even in an idea. The comparison is what excites this sense of beauty even when the original being imitated is not singularly beautiful.

Hutcheson wondered why there would be a question about whether there were internal senses since they, like the external ones, are prominent in our own experiences. Perhaps one of the reasons that the internal senses are questioned more than the external is because there are no common names for them such as ‘hearing’ and ‘seeing’ (Inquiry, I. VI, IX). There is no easy way to describe the sense that feels beauty, yet we all experience it in the presence of beauty. Though this internal sense can be influenced by knowledge and experience it is not consciously controlled and is involuntary. Moving aesthetics away from logic and mathematical truths does not make it any less real and important for our pleasure as felt in the appreciation and experience of beauty and harmony. The internal senses also include the moral sense, so called by Shaftesbury and developed thoroughly by Hutcheson.

3. Moral Sense Faculty

a. Operations of moral sense faculty

Hutcheson, like Shaftesbury, claimed moral judgments were made in the human faculty that Shaftesbury called a moral sense. Both believed human nature contained all it needed to make moral decisions, along with inclinations to be moral.

The process, Hutcheson described, begins with a feeling of pleasure or advantage felt in the moral sense faculty—not necessarily to us but advantageous to someone or generally for everyone. This perception of pleasure has a specific moral flavor and causes us to feel moral approbation. We feel this pleasure when considering what is good or beneficial to others as a part of our natural instinct of benevolence. The things pursued for this pleasure are wanted because of our self-love and interest in the good for others. So first there is a sense of pleasure; then there is the interest in what causes the pleasure. From there, our experience or reason can tell us what objects have and may continue to give us pleasure or advantage (Hutcheson 1725, 70). For Hutcheson, the moral sense thus described is from God, implanted, not like innate ideas, but as an innate sense of pleasure for objects that are not necessarily to our advantage—and for nobler pleasures like caring for others or appreciation of harmony (Hutcheson 1725, I.VIII, 83).

Evaluating what is good or not—what we morally approve of or disapprove of—is done by this moral sense. The moral sense is not the basis of moral decisions or the justification of our disapproval as the rationalists claim; instead it is better explained as the faculty with which we feel the value of an action. It does not justify our evaluation; the moral sense gives us our evaluation. The moral faculty gives us our sense of valuing—not feeling in an emotional sense as that would be something like sadness or joy.  There is feeling, but the feeling is a valuing type of feeling.

Like the other internal senses of beauty and harmony, people are born with a moral sense. We know this because we experience moral feelings of approbation and disapprobation. We do not choose to make moral approvals or disapprovals; they just happen to us and we feel the approvals when they occur. Hutcheson put it this way: “approbation is not what we can voluntarily bring upon ourselves” (Hutcheson 1728, I. 412). He continued that in spite of the fact that it is a pleasurable experience to approve of actions, we cannot just approve of anything or anyone when we want to. Hutcheson gives illustrations of this: for instance, people do not “approve as virtuous the eating a bunch of grapes, taking a glass of wine, or sitting down when tired” (ibid.). The point is that moral approvals and disapprovals done by our moral sense are specific in nature and only operate when there is an action that can be appropriately judged of by our moral sense (ibid.). Another way to make this point is to compare the moral sense to the olfactory sense. I can put my nose to this ceramic cup in front of me but my nose will not smell anything if there is nothing to smell. The moral sense operates when an idea touches it the same way a nose smells when there is an odor reaching it. No odor, no smell; no moral issue, no moral sentiment. For Hutcheson, the moral sense is involved and included when the agent reflects on an action or a spectator observes them in reference to the action’s circumstances, specifically those whom it affects (Hutcheson 1728, I. 408). So when an action has consequences for others, it is more likely to awaken our moral sensibility.

Reasoning and information can change the evaluation of the moral sense, but no amount of reasoning can or does precede the moral sense in regard to its approval of what is for the public good. Reason does, however, inform the moral sense, as discussed below. The moral sense approves of the good for others. This concern for others by the moral sense is what is natural to humankind, Hutcheson contended. Reason gives content to the moral sense, informing it of what is good for others and the public good (Hutcheson 1728, I. 411).

Some may think Hutcheson a utilitarian and certainly no thorough accounting of historical utilitarianism is complete without a mention of Hutcheson. Consider the following statement from Hutcheson: “In the same manner, the moral evil, or vice, is as the degree of misery, and number of sufferers; so that, that action is best, which procures the greatest happiness for the greatest numbers; and that, worst, which, in like manner, occasions, misery.” Preceding this, though, is the phrase, “…we are led by our moral sense of virtue to judge thus…” (Inquiry, II, 3, 8). So it is our moral sense that evaluates goodness and evil and does seem to evaluate much like a utilitarian, but it is not bound by the utilitarian rule—moral sense evaluations are normatively privileged and prior to moral rules of any kind.

In Illustrations upon the Moral Sense (1728), Hutcheson gives definitions of both the approbation of our own actions and those of others. Approbation of our own action is given when we are pleased with ourselves for doing the action and/or pleased with our intentions for doing the action. Hutcheson puts it this way: “[A]pprobation of our own action denotes, or is attended with, a pleasure in the contemplation of it, and in reflection upon the affections which inclined us to it” (I. 403). Consider what happens when someone picks up and returns something that another person drops. In response to the action, the person who picked up the dropped item would have feelings of approbation toward their own action. This person would be happy with what they did, especially after giving it some thought. Further, they would be pleased if their own intentions were ones with which they could also be pleased. The intention could possibly be that they just wanted to help this person; however, if the intention was to gain advantage with the other person, then they would not be as pleased with themselves. Approbation of another’s action is much the same except that the observer is pleased to witness the action of the other person and feels affection toward the agent of the action. Again Hutcheson:

[A]pprobation of the action of another has some little pleasure in attending it in the observer, and raises love toward the agent, in whom the quality approved is deemed to reside, and not in the observer, who has a satisfaction in the act of approving (Hutcheson 1728, 403).

There is a distinction, Hutcheson claimed, between choosing to do an action or wanting someone else to do an action and our approbation of the action. According to Hutcheson, we often act in ways we disapprove of (ibid. 403). All I have to think of is the extra cookie I have just consumed: upon reflection I am not pleased with my choice; I disapprove of eating the cookie.

b. Sense vs. Reason

In response to the difficulty philosophers seem to have understanding the separate operations of sensing—done by the moral sense—and intellectual reasoning, Hutcheson referred to the ancients—a common element in his writing—and the division of the soul between the will (desires, appetites, ‘sensus’) and the intellect. Philosophers who think reasons motivate and/or judge have conflated the will into the intellect (Hutcheson 1728, 405). In this same discussion, Hutcheson, borrowing from Aristotle, explained that reason and the intellect help determine how to reach an end or goal. Yet the desire for that goal is the job of the will. The will is moved by the desire for that end which, of course, for Aristotle, was happiness (ibid. I. 405-6).

There has to be a desire for the will to choose something. Something is chosen because it is seen as a possible fulfillment of a human desire. For Hutcheson, there is a natural instinct and desire for the good of others. Without this natural desire, Hutcheson claimed, no one would care whether an action benefits or harms one person or many. Information may be sound and true about the dangers of an action, yet without the instinct to care about those who would be benefited or harmed the information would not move our passions (ibid. I. 406-7). The only reason to care about a natural disaster 1,000 miles away where we do not know anyone and we are not affected even indirectly is that we care about others in general and do not wish harm on them. A person can only want something if the desire for it is connected to or understood to be satisfying a certain natural instinct or affection (ibid. I. 404). This instinct or desire for the welfare of others is what influences our moral sense to approve or disapprove of an action.

Reasons and discussions that excite and motivate presuppose instincts and affections (ibid.). To be moved means there is an instinct that is moved. Consider a different type of instinct like one’s instinct for happiness. Hutcheson explained it this way: “[T]here is an instinct or desire fixed in his nature, determining him to pursue his happiness: but it is not this reflection on his own nature, or this [some] proposition which excites or determines him, but the instinct itself” (ibid. I. 406). It is not the proposition that a certain act will produce lots of money that excites a person, but rather the instinct toward happiness and the belief that money will bring the desired happiness. So reasoning that leads a person to believe that money will bring happiness presupposes an instinct that values happiness. Reasons that justify or explain something as being moral or immoral presuppose a moral sense (ibid. 404). If there are reasons for something and those reasons are considered, a moral sense must exist that cares about and utilizes the information.

Hutcheson thought one of the reasons there was confusion and opposition to the idea of moral judgment coming from one’s instincts or affections is the violent, passionate actions that are observed in people and would not be effective as moral evaluators. Yet Hutcheson was not claiming that these passions and out-of-control desires are the source of moral judgment; it is “the calm desire or affection which employs our reason freely…” (ibid. IV. 413). Also, for Hutcheson, “the most perfect virtue consists in the calm, impassionate benevolence, rather than in particular affection” (ibid.). So not only are the moral passions calm, they naturally respond positively to behaviors that benefit the public good. Hutcheson did not claim that this should be the case and, therefore, it is not the normative claim utilitarianism makes; rather, what Hutcheson argued is that his experiences and moral sense find this to be the case.

To the criticism that a person’s moral sense might be judged good or evil, Hutcheson replied that this was not possible. He compared judging the moral sense as good or evil with calling the “power of tasting, sweet or bitter; or of seeing, strait or crooked, white or black” (ibid. I. 409). So a person cannot have a morally evil moral sense even if this person disagrees with another. Hutcheson did see that people may differ in taste—and various people could and do—and that the moral sense can be silenced or ignored (ibid. 410). He contended, however, that these differences in taste and evaluation do not indicate evil in the moral sense itself.

Hutcheson did address the issue of uniformity in moral sentiments by answering whether or not we can know others will also approve of that which we approve (ibid. IV. 414). Though there is no certainty of agreement, the moral sense as natural to humankind is largely uniform. Hutcheson added that God approves of benevolence and kindness and so he created human nature with the capability to make the same types of approvals, and this is done by the moral sense. Our moral sense naturally, according to Hutcheson, approves of kindness and caring for others, and unless there is a prejudiced view of whether the action is truly kind and publicly useful, it is not probable that a person would judge incorrectly (ibid.). So, yes, there is disagreement sometimes, but the disagreement is not rooted in self-interest.

c. Basis of Moral Determinations

For Hutcheson, the foundation of our moral determinations is not self-love. What is basic to morality is our inclination for benevolence—an integral part of our moral evaluations which will be more fully examined in the following section. In response to the Hobbesian doctrine of egoism as advanced by authors like Bernard Mandeville, Hutcheson set out to prove the existence of natural feelings like benevolence in order to show that not every action was performed out of self-interest. Although the following quote demonstrates that Hutcheson worried that our natural benevolence could get caught up with our selfish nature, he hoped people could realize that our natural benevolence will allow us to see the higher character and that we can understand and encourage what is best for everyone:

Let the misery of excessive selfishness, and all its passions, be but once explain’d, that so self-love may cease to counteract our natural propensity to benevolence, and when this noble disposition gets loose from these bonds of ignorance, and false views of interest, it shall be assisted even by self-love, and grow strong enough to make a noble virtuous character. Then he is to enquire, by reflection upon human affairs, what course of action does most effectually promote the universal good… (Hutcheson 1725, VII. 155).

However, even when selfishness drowns out our benevolent instincts, our moral sense still operates in response to what is good for others.

Hutcheson’s moral sense theory helped to conceptually circumvent the problems that stem from a strict doctrine of egoism. He claimed that it is natural for us to want good things for others. When someone’s moral sense operates and they judge an action as morally wrong, the moral sense is not why they feel the wrongness, it is how they feel it. It is like an applause meter that evaluates the morality that is expressed in the sentiment: “I morally disapprove of that.” This last statement is a report of the moral sense into an opinion of morality, moving from a feeling to an idea. Yet, if the moral sense faculty works the way Hutcheson describes, there needs to be an innate benevolence, and that case is made by Hutcheson.

4. Benevolence: Response to Hobbes and Pufendorf

Hutcheson’s arguments for an instinctual benevolence are in both Reflections on the Common Systems of Morality (1724) and the Inaugural Lecture on the Nature of Man (1730), both found in Francis Hutcheson: Two Texts on Human Nature (Mautner 1993). In these texts Hutcheson responds to both Thomas Hobbes and Samuel Pufendorf, arguing that from our own experiences we can see that there are, in fact, disinterested motivations common in humankind. Hutcheson specifically claims that the term ‘state of nature’ as used by Hobbes and Pufendorf creates a misunderstanding of what is actually present in human nature. The actual ‘state of nature,’ for Hutcheson, includes the benevolence he claimed as instinctual to humankind. The particular Pufendorf claim that Hutcheson was concerned with was that people would not be virtuous unless they believed in divine punishment and reward (Mautner 1993, 18). This is not unlike Hobbes, who claimed that without civil authority, life for humankind would be “solitary, poor, nasty, brutish and short” (Hobbes 1651, 13.8). For both Hobbes and Pufendorf, the natural ‘state of nature’ is unappealing and full of egoistic defensive protections against others. In opposition, Hutcheson claims the nature of humankind as created by God includes a natural instinct for benevolence. Hutcheson considered the state of nature as described by Hobbes and Pufendorf as an uncultivated state (Hutcheson 1730, 132). He described the cultivated state as one in which a person’s mind is actively learning and developing. These cultivated persons are, for Hutcheson, truly following their own nature as designed by God. In this cultivated state, persons take care of themselves and want all of humankind to be safe and sound (Hutcheson 1730, 133). Hutcheson would have preferred that Hobbes and Pufendorf had used a term other than ‘state of nature’—perhaps ‘state of freedom’—to describe the uncultivated state. This may seem like an unimportant distinction, but consider it for a moment: if humankind is naturally as Hobbes and Pufendorf described, then they need to be forced to develop in cooperative ways, which would be against their nature. If humankind were by nature caring of others, as Hutcheson proposed, then individuals would not need to be forced to cooperate.

Besides the label, ‘state of nature,’ Hutcheson had other objections to the negative characterization of humankind ascribed by Pufendorf and Hobbes. Surely we experience other aspects of people that are not cruel or selfish. We also experience in ourselves a caring and a concern for others. Hutcheson wondered why there was no attention or acknowledgement given by Hobbes or Pufendorf to people’s natural propensity and:

kind instinct [s] to associate; of natural affections, of compassion, of love of company, a sense of gratitude, a determination to honour and love the authors of any good offices toward any part of mankind, as well as of those toward our selves… (Hutcheson 1724, 100).

These characteristics, for Hutcheson, are certainly a part of what we experience in ourselves and in others. We reach out to people for friendship and are impressed and grateful to people who kindly help others as well as ourselves.

Hutcheson also added that human beings naturally care what others think of them. He described this characteristic, observed in others and experienced in ourselves, as “a natural delight men take in being esteemed and honoured by others for good actions…” These characteristics, “all may be observed to prevail exceedingly in humane life,” are ones that we witness daily in people, and are ignored and therefore unaccounted for by Hobbes and Pufendorf (Hutcheson 1724, 100-1). Here, Hutcheson took care to describe his own experiences, and those of others for whom caring for others is not uncommon, and yet these characteristics are missing in the Hobbesian model of humankind. And it is not a meek or quiet instinct: “we shall find one of the greatest springs of their [men in general] actions to be love toward others…a strong delight in being honoured by others for kind actions…” (Hutcheson 1724, 101). Along with his disagreement with the Hobbesian characteristics of humankind, Hutcheson also discusses whether all human action comes from self-interest, arguing against psychological egoism. Hutcheson acknowledged that it is in everyone’s advantage to form cooperative units and that this interdependence is necessary for mankind’s survival (Hutcheson 1730, 134-5). This view agrees partially with what is referred to as prudentialism, as discussed by Hobbes and Pufendorf. Prudentialism is the theory that all cooperation and sociability comes from a self-interested motive. So people make friends or are kind because they know in the long run the effort will benefit their projects and survival—it is prudent to at least feign to care for others. Where Hutcheson disagreed with Hobbes and Pufendorf was over the claim that self-interest is the only motive for social life and/or caring for others. Hutcheson claimed that human beings have other natural affections and appetites “immediately implanted by nature, which are not directed towards physical pleasures or advantage but towards certain higher things which in themselves depend on associating with others” (Hutcheson 1730, 135).

Hutcheson could not imagine a rational creature sufficiently satisfied or happy in a state that would not include love and friendship with others. Hutcheson allowed that this person could have all the pleasant sensations of the external senses along with “the perceptions of beauty, order, harmony.” But that wouldn’t be enough (ibid. V. 144).  When discussing the pleasures of wealth and other external pleasures, Hutcheson connected the enjoyments of these with our experiences and involvement with others. For Hutcheson, even in an imaginary state of wealth, we include others. Hutcheson asked whether these kinds of ideas of wealth do not always include “some moral enjoyments of society, some communication of pleasure, something of love, of friendship, of esteem, of gratitude” (ibid. VI.147). Hutcheson asked more directly, “Who ever pretended to a taste of these pleasures without society” (ibid. VI. 147). So even in our imagination, while enjoying great wealth and material success, we are doing so in the company of others.

There is another minor disagreement between Hobbes and Hutcheson over what is considered funny, specifically what makes us laugh. Though taking up only small sections in Hobbes’ Human Nature (9. 13) and Leviathan (I.6.42), Hobbes’ claim that infirmity causes laughter was addressed by Hutcheson in “Thoughts [Reflections] on Laughter and Observations on ‘The Fable of the Bees.’” In this collection of six letters, Hutcheson also addresses his disagreements with Mandeville.  These letters, though not as well known today, could well have been quite influential essays when they were published originally in the Dublin Journal. They are also an excellent illustration of Hutcheson’s skills in argumentation.

5. Influences on Hume and Smith 

The moral sentimentalist theories of David Hume and Adam Smith were able to move past the Hobbesian view of human nature as both men considered Hutcheson to have handily defeated Hobbes’ argument. Hume does not take on Hobbes directly as he explains that “[m]any able philosophers have shown the insufficiency of these systems” (EPM, Appendix 2.6.17). Without Hutcheson’s successful argument for natural benevolence in human nature, Hume’s and Smith’s moral theories were not feasible because an innate care and concern for others and for society are both basic to their theories.

As a professor at the University of Glasgow, Hutcheson taught Smith, and his writings influenced both Smith and Hume by setting the empirical and psychological tone for both of their moral theories. Hutcheson particularly set up Hume’s moral theory in three ways. Hutcheson argued—as far as Hume was concerned, successfully—against humankind being completely self-interested. Hutcheson also described the mechanism of the internal moral sense that generates moral sentiments (although Hume’s description differed slightly, the mechanism in Hume’s account has many of the same characteristics). In connection to these two Hutcheson themes (the argument against human beings as solely self-interested and a moral sense wherein moral sentiments are felt), Hutcheson also made an argument for a naturally occurring instinct of benevolence in humankind. It was with these three Hutcheson themes that Hume and Smith began articulating their respective moral theories.

It is impossible to know how much Smith was influenced by Hutcheson. Many of Smith’s theories, especially concerning government regulations, property rights and unalienable rights, certainly resemble those espoused by Hutcheson. These were all addressed in the second treatise of the Inquiry (sections v-vii), where Hutcheson aligns the naturally occurring benevolence with feelings of honor, shame and pity, and with the evaluations of the moral sense—and also explains the way benevolence affects human affairs and the happiness of others. Smith’s ideas in Wealth of Nations align with Hutcheson on such issues as the division of labor and the compatibility of the amount and difficulty of labor with its value. Smith was also influenced by Hutcheson’s discussion of the cost of goods being dependent on the difficulty of acquiring them plus the demand for them (Systems II. 10. 7). Also of note in the same chapter is an insightful description for the use of coinage, gold and silver in the exchange of goods and the role of government in the use of coins. Overall, Hutcheson’s timely and meticulous attention to these kinds of social, economic and political details was not only instrumental to Smith’s development but also to that of the American colonies. The latter could have resulted specifically from Hutcheson’s A Short Introduction to Moral Philosophy being translated from Latin into English and used at American universities such as Yale.

6. References and Further Reading

a. Works by Hutcheson

  • Hutcheson, Francis. 1724. Reflections on the Common Systems of Morality. In Francis Hutcheson: On Human Nature, ed. Thomas Mautner, 1993. 96-106. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press
  • Hutcheson, Francis. Philosophical Writings, ed. R. S. Downie. Everyman’s Library. 1994. London: Orion Publishing Group.
  • Hutcheson’s Writings (selection) ed. John McHugh in the Library of Scottish Philosophy series ed. Gordon Graham. Forthcoming 2014
  • Hutcheson, Francis. 1725. An Inquiry Concerning the Original of Our Ideas of Virtue or Moral Good. Selections reprinted in British Moralists, ed. L. A. Selby –Bigge, 1964. 69-177. Indianapolis: Bobbs-Merrill.
  • Hutcheson, Francis. 1728. Illustrations upon the Moral Sense. Selections reprinted in British moralists, ed. L. A. Selby-Bigge. 1964. 403-418. Indianapolis: Bobbs-Merrill.
  • Hutcheson, Francis. 1730. Inaugural Lecture on the Social Nature of Man. In Francis Hutcheson: On Human Nature, ed. Thomas Mautner. 1993. 124-147. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Hutcheson, Francis. 1742. An Essay on the Nature and Conduct of the Passions and Affections. Selections reprinted in British moralists, ed. L. A. Selby-Bigge. 1964. 392-402. Indianapolis: Bobbs-Merrill.
  • Hutcheson, Francis. 1755. A System of Moral Philosophy. Selection reprinted in British moralists, ed. L. A. Selby-Bigge. 1964. 419-425. Indianapolis: Bobbs-Merrill.

i. Collected Works and Correspondence

  • Liberty Fund Natural Law and Enlightenment series: General Editor, Knud Haakonssen. Liberty Fund, Indianapolis, Indiana U.S.A.
  • 1725 An Inquiry into the Original of Our ideas of Beauty and Virtue. 2004
  • 1742 An Essay on the Nature and Conduct of the Passions and Affections, with the Illustrations on the Moral Sense. 2002
  • 1742 Logic, Metaphysics, and the Natural Sociability of Mankind. 2006
  • 1745 (Translated into English 1747) Philosophiae Moralis Instituitio Compendiaria with A Short Introduction to Moral Philosophy. ed. Luigi Turco. 2007
  • 1755 Meditations of the Emperor Marcus Aurelius Antonius. 2008
  • 1729 “Thoughts on Laughter and Observations on ‘The Fable of the Bees’” in The Correspondence and Occasional Writings of Francis Hutcheson  2014

b. Secondary Readings

  • Berry, Christopher J. 2003. “Sociality and Socialization.” The Cambridge Companion to the Scottish Enlightenment, ed. Alexander Broadie, Cambridge University Press.
  • Blackstone, William T. 1965. Francis Hutcheson & Contemporary Ethical Theory. University of Georgia Press.
  • Broadie, Alexander, ed. 2003. The Cambridge Companion to the Scottish Enlightenment. Cambridge University Press.
  • Brown, Michael. 2002. Francis Hutcheson in Dublin 1719-1730: The Crucible of his Thought. Four Courts Press.
  • Carey, Daniel. 1999. Hutcheson. In The Dictionary of Eighteenth-Century British Philosophers, eds. John Yolton, John Valdimir Price, and John Stephens. Two volumes.Vol. II: 453-460. Bristol, England: Thoemmes Press.
  • D’Arms, Justin and Daniel Jacobson. 2000. Sentiment and Value. In Ethics 110 (July): 722-748. The University of Chicago.
  • Daniels, Norman and Keith Lehrer. Eds. 1998. Philosophical Ethics. Dimensions of Philosophy Series. Boulder, Colorado: Westview Press.
  • Darwall, Stephen. 1995. The British Moralists and the Internal ‘Ought’ 1640 – 1740. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Darwell, Stephen, Allan Gibbard, and Peter Railton, eds.1997. Moral Discourse and Practice. Oxford University Press.
  • Emmanuel, Steven, ed. 2001. The Blackwell Guide to the Modern Philosophers. Massachusetts: Blackwell Press.
  • Gill, Michael. 1996. Fantastic Associations and Addictive General Rules: A fundamental difference between Hutcheson and Hume. Hume Studies vol. XXII, no. 1 (April): 23-48.
  • Graham, Gordon. 2001. Morality and Feeling in the Scottish Enlightenment. Philosophy. Volume 76.
  • Haakonssen, Knud. 1996. Natural Law and Moral Philosophy: From Grotius to the Scottish Enlightenment. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Haakonssen, Knud. 1998. Adam Smith. Aldershot, England: Dartmouth Publishing Company Limited and Ashgate Publishing Limited.
  • Harman, Gilbert. 2000. Explaining Value. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Herman, Arthur. 2002. How the Scots Invented the Modern World: The True story of How Western Europe’s Poorest Nation Created Our World. Broadway Books.
  • Hope, Vincent. 1989. Virtues by Consensus: The Moral Philosophy of Hutcheson, Hume, and Adam Smith. Oxford University Press.
  • Hobbes, Thomas. 1651. Leviathan, ed. Edwin Curley. 1994. Indiana, USA: Hackett Press.
  • Hobbes, Thomas. 1651. Human Nature: or the Fundamental Elements of Policy. In British Moralists, ed. D.D. Raphael, 1991. Pp. 3-17. Indiana USA: Hackett Press.
  • Hume, David. 1740. A Treatise of Human Nature, eds. L. A. Selby-Bigge and P. H. Nidditch. second edition, 1978. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Hume, David. 1751. Enquiries Concerning the Human Understanding and Concerning the Principles of Morals, eds. L. A. Selby-Bigge and P. H. Nidditch. Revised third edition, 1975. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • LaFollette, Hugh, ed. 2000. The Blackwell Guide to Ethical Theory. Massachusetts: Blackwell Publishers.
  • LaFollette, Hugh. 1991. The truth in Ethical Relativism. Journal of Social Philosophy. 146-54.
  • Kivy, Peter. 2003. The Seventh Sense: A Study of Francis Hutcheson’s Aesthetics and Its Influence in Eighteenth-Century Britain. 2nd edition. New York: Franklin.
  • Mackie, J. L. 1998. The Subjectivity of Values. In Ethical Theories, third edition, ed. Louis Pojman. 518 – 537.Wadworth Publishing.
  • Mautner, Thomas, ed. 1993. Francis Hutcheson: Two Texts on Human Nature. Cambridge University Press.
  • McDowell, John.1997. Projection and Truth in Ethics. In Moral Discourse and Practice, eds. Stephen Darwall, Allan Gibbard, Peter Railton. Chapter 12: 215 – 225. Oxford Press.
  • McNaughton, David. 1999. Shaftesbury. In The Dictionary of Eighteenth-Century British Philosophers, eds. John Yolton, John Valdimir Price, and John Stephens. Two volumes. Vol.1: 781-788. Bristol, England: Thoemmes Press.
  • Mercer, Philip. 1972. Sympathy and Ethics. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Mercer, Philip. 1995. “Hume’s concept of sympathy.” Ethics, Passions, Sympathy, ‘Is’ and ‘Ought.’  David Hume: Critical Assessments. Volume IV: 437 – 60. London and New York: Routledge Press.
  • Moore, James. 1990. “The Two Systems of Francis Hutcheson: On the Origins of the Scottish Enlightenment,” in Studies in the Philosophy of the Scottish Enlightenment, ed. M.A. Stewart. Pp. 37-59. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Moore, James. 1995. “Hume and Hutcheson.” Hume and Hume’s Connections, eds. M. A. Stewart and James P. Wright. 23-57. The Pennsylvania State University Press.
  • Price, John Valdimir. 1999. “Hume.” The dictionary of eighteenth-century British philosophers, eds. John Yolton, John Valdimir Price, and John Stephens. Two volumes. Volume II: 440-446. Bristol, England: Thoemmes Press.
  • Russell, Paul. 1995. Freedom and Moral Sentiments, Oxford University Press.
  • Schneewind, J. B. 1990. Moral Philosophy from Montagne to Kant: An Anthology. Volumes I and II. Cambridge University Press.
  • Schneider, Louis. 1967. The Scottish Moralists: On Human Nature and Society. Phoenix Books, University of Chicago.
  • Scott, William Robert. 1900. Francis Hutcheson, His Life, Teaching and Position in the History of Philosophy. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, Reprint 1966 New York: A. M. Kelley.
  • Strasser, Mark. 1990. Francis Hutcheson’s Moral Theory. Wakefield, New Hampshire: Longwood Academic.
  • Strasser, Mark. 1991-2. “Hutcheson on Aesthetic Perception.” Philosophia 21: 107-18
  • Stewart, M. A. and Wright, John P., eds. 1995. Hume and Hume’s Connections. The Pennsylvania State University Press.
  • Taylor, W. L. 1965. Francis Hutcheson and David Hume as Predecessors of Adam Smith. Duke University Press.
  • Turco, Luigi. 2003. “Moral Sense and the Foundations of Morals.” The Cambridge Companion to the Scottish Enlightenment, ed. Alexander Broadie, Cambridge University Press.
  • Yolton, John, John Valdimir Price, and John Stephens, eds.1999. The Dictionary of Eighteenth-Century British Philosophers, Two volumes. Bristol, England: Thoemmes Press.


Author Information

Phyllis Vandenberg
Grand Valley State University
U. S. A.


Abigail DeHart
Grand Valley State University
U. S. A.

Bernard Mandeville (1670—1733)

Bernard Mandeville is primarily remembered for his impact on discussions of morality and economic theory in the early eighteenth century. His most noteworthy and notorious work is The Fable of the Bees, which triggered immense public criticism at the time. He had a particular influence on philosophers of the Scottish Enlightenment, most notably Francis Hutcheson, David Hume, Jean-Jacques Rousseau, and Adam Smith. The Fable’s overall influence on the fields of ethics and economics is, perhaps, one of the greatest and most provocative of all early-eighteenth century English works.

The controversy sparked by the Fable was over Mandeville’s proposal that vices, such as vanity and greed, result in publically beneficial results. Along the same lines, he proposed that many of the actions commonly thought to be virtuous were, instead, self-interested at their core and therefore vicious. He was a critic of moral systems that claimed humans had natural feelings of benevolence toward one another, and he instead focused attention on self-interested passions like pride and vanity that led to apparent acts of benevolence. This caused his readers to imagine him to be a cruder reincarnation of Thomas Hobbes, particularly as a proponent of egoism. What follows is an overview of Mandeville’s life and influence, paying specific attention to his impact on discussions of morality and economic theory.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. The Fable of the Bees
  3. The Private Vice, Public Benefit Paradox
  4. The Egoist “Culprit”
  5. On Charity
  6. Influence on Economic Theory
  7. References and Further Reading
    1. Works by Mandeville
    2. Secondary Literature

1. Life

Mandeville was born in 1670 to a distinguished family in the Netherlands, either in or nearby Rotterdam. His father was a physician, as was his great-grandfather, a factor that, no doubt, influenced his own educational path in medicine at the University of Leyden, receiving his M.D. in 1691. He also held a baccalaureate in philosophy, and wrote his dissertation defending the Cartesian doctrine that animal bodies are mere automata because they lack immaterial souls.

Mandeville moved to England some time after the Glorious Revolution of 1688, and it was here he settled permanently, married, and had at least two children. His first published works in English were anonymous pieces in 1703 entitled The Pamphleteers: A Satyr and Some Fables after the Easie and Familiar Method of Monsieur de la Fontaine. In the first, Mandeville defends against those “pamphleteers” who were criticizing both the Glorious Revolution and the late King William III. In Some Fables, he translated twenty-seven of La Fontaine’s Fables, adding two of his own in the same comic style as employed in his later Grumbling Hive.

Although Dr. Mandeville supported his family through his work as a physician, he was also engaged in many literary-political activities. His political interests were not directly obvious until 1714 when he published a piece of political propaganda, The Mischiefs that Ought Justly to be Apprehended from a Whig-Government, which demonstrates his support for the Whig party. Throughout his life, he published numerous smaller works and essays, most of them containing harsh social criticism. Published in 1720, Free Thoughts on Religion, the Church and National Happiness was his final party political tract in which he endorses the advantages of Whig governance as well as advancing a skeptical view of the religious establishment and priestcraft.

Mandeville still continued to publish other provocative pieces, for example: A Modest Defence of Publick Stews (1724), containing controversial plans which would create public housing for prostitution. Within this piece he argued that the best societal solution was to legalize prostitution and regulate it under strict government supervision. Mandeville’s most notable and notorious work, however, was The Fable of the Bees; it began as an anonymous pamphlet of doggerel verse in 1705, entitled The Grumbling Hive: Or, Knaves Turn’d Honest. More is known of Mandeville’s writings than of his life, and so it is most useful to turn to The Fable for a further examination of his history.

2. The Fable of the Bees

It is rare that a poem finds its way into serious philosophical discussion, as The Grumbling Hive: or, Knaves Turn’d Honest has done. Written in the style of his previous fables, the 433-line poem served as the foundation for Mandeville’s principal work: The Fable of the Bees: or, Private Vices, Publick Benefits. The Fable grew over a period of twenty-four years, eventually reaching its final, sixth edition in 1729. In this work, Mandeville gives his analysis of how private vices result in public benefits like industry, employment and economic flourishing. Interpreted by his contemporaries as actively promoting vice as the singular explanation and precondition for a thriving economic society, this central analysis was the primary reason for Mandeville’s reputation as a scandalous libertine. This was a misreading of Mandeville’s position. Most of the work he later produced was either an expansion or defense of the Fable in the light of contemporary opposition.

The Grumbling Hive poem is a short piece, later published as just a section of the larger Fable, which was mostly comprised as a series of commentaries upon the 1705 poem. It immediately introduces its reader to a spacious and luxurious hive of bees. This hive was full of vice, “Yet the whole mass a paradise” (The Fable, Vol. I, pg. 31). The society flourished in many ways, but no trade was without dishonesty. Oddly, the worst cheats of the hive were those who complained most about this dishonesty and fraud so plaguing their society. Here the poem dramatically turns as “all the rogues cry’d brazenly, Good gods, had we but honesty!” (The Fable, Vol. I, pg. 33) Jove, the bees’ god, angrily rid the hive of all vice, but the results were catastrophic as the newly virtuous bees were no longer driven to compete with one another. As a result, industry collapsed, and the once flourishing society was destroyed in battle, leaving few bees remaining. These bees, to avoid the vices of ease and extravagance, flew into a hollow tree in a contented honesty.

The implication of the poem is clear for the beehive, but perhaps not for humanity: it seems paradoxical to suggest that a society is better when it promotes a culture characterized by private vice. However, it is precisely this paradox on which Mandeville draws to make his larger point. The “Moral” at the end of the poem claims, “Fools only strive To make a Great an’ honest Hive.”(The Fable, Vol. I, pg. 36) Mandeville thought the discontent over moral corruptness, or the private vice of society, was either hypocritical or incoherent, as such vice served an indispensable role in the economy by stimulating trade, industry and upward economic improvement i.e., public benefit. The desire to create a purely virtuous society was based on “a vain EUTOPIA seated in the Brain”: fancying that a nation can, with virtues like honesty, attain great wealth and success, when in fact it is the desire to improve one’s material condition in acts of self-indulgence that lies at the heart of economic productivity (The Fable, Vol. I, pg. 36).

The poem’s humorous ending demonstrates that vice can look surprisingly like virtue if implemented correctly. To Mandeville’s readers this was a deeply offensive conclusion to draw, and yet for almost twenty years his work went largely unnoticed. In 1714, Mandeville published the Fable of the Bees, presented as a series of “Remarks” offering an extended commentary upon the original “The Grumbling Hive”, and intended to explain and elucidate the meaning of the earlier poem. But the Fable initially garnered little attention. It was not until a second edition in 1723, featuring a new addition, “An Essay on Charity and Charity-Schools”, that Mandeville gained the notoriety that would make him infamous amongst his contemporaries. The 1723 edition soon prompted reproach from the public, and was even presented before the Grand Jury of Middlesex and there declared a public nuisance. The presentment of the Jury claimed that the Fable intended to disparage religion and virtue as detrimental to society, and to promote vice as a necessary component of a well-functioning state. Though never censored, the book and author achieved sudden disrepute, and the Fable found itself the subject of conversation amongst clergymen, journalists, and philosophers.

3. The Private Vice, Public Benefit Paradox

Rather than giving a lengthy argument proving that private vice can be useful, Mandeville illustrates in the Fable that vice can be disguised, and yet is necessary in the attainment of collective goods, thus resulting in a paradox of “private vices, public benefits”. For instance, and to take one of Mandeville’s central examples, pride is a vice, and yet without pride there would be no fashion industry, as individuals would lack the motivation to buy new and expensive clothes with which to try and impress their peers. If pride were eradicated tomorrow, the result would leave hundreds of companies bankrupt, prompt mass unemployment, risk the collapse of industry, and in turn devastate both the economic security and with it the military power of the British commercial state. Similarly, and on a smaller scale, without thieves there would be no locksmiths, without quarrels over property, no lawyers, and so on.

Crucially, however, Mandeville did not claim a paradox of private vice, public virtue. The “benefits” that arose from individually vicious actions were morally compromised due to their being rooted in private self-seeking- one of Mandeville’s starkest challenges to his contemporaries, and a point which makes his fundamental philosophical commitments difficult to interpret. It is still disputed as to what, exactly, Mandeville thought the relation between private vice and public benefit should be: was he merely holding up a mirror to a corrupt society, satirizing those who claimed commercial opulence was straightforwardly compatible with virtue? Or did he seriously believe that modern commercial states should abandon their luxurious comforts for austere self-denial, so as to escape the paradox he alleged? Whatever the case, his notoriety arose from placing the two together, a little too closely for most of his readers’ taste and comfort. Mandeville’s paradox alleged, unapologetically, the tendency of men to hide vices behind socially acceptable forms of behavior, thereby appearing virtuous.  On the one hand, Mandeville wished to imply that common sense views are not as reliant on common sense as they first appear: what looks like virtuous behavior may in fact be disguised selfishness. On the other, those who preach virtue may turn out to be deluded hypocrites: real virtue would mean the collapse of all the benefits that supervene on private vice. Chief amongst Mandeville’s targets was Anthony Ashley Cooper, Third Earl of Shaftesbury, who claimed that a large-scale flourishing commercial society was compatible with individuals securing virtue by engaging in rational self-restraint whilst enjoying the benefits of economic advancement. For Mandeville, this was incorrect and preposterous: society could be prosperous and based on private vices, or poor and based on private virtues- but not both.

4. The Egoist “Culprit”

Mandeville’s psychological examination of humankind, often perceived as cynical, is a large part of his genius and also his infamy. Much in keeping with the physician he was, it is fitting that he took on the task of diagnosing society in order to expose what he believed to be the true motives of humankind. Nonetheless, there was a religious component in Mandeville’s thought. His man was necessarily fallen man: capable only of pleasing himself, the individual human being was a postlapsarian creature, irredeemably selfish and greedy for its own private pleasure, at which it always aimed even if it hid such self-seeking behind more respectable facades (The Fable, Vol. I, pg. 348). Mandeville’s examination showed the ways in which people hid their real thoughts and motives behind a mask in order to fake sociability by not offending the selfish pride of their peers. Ironically, Mandeville’s own honesty led him into trouble: he boldly claimed vice was inevitably the foundation of a thriving society, insofar as all human beings had to act viciously because their status as selfish fallen men ensured that whatever displays they affected, at bottom selfishness always dictated their actions. All social virtues are evolved from self-love, which is at the core irredeemably vicious. Mandeville also challenged conventional moral terminology by taking a term like “vice” and showing that, despite its negative connotations, it was beneficial to society at large.

In its time, most responses to the Fable were designed as refutations (and understandably so, as few desired association with Mandeville’s central thesis) mainly focused on its analysis of the foundations of morality. To many, Mandeville was on par with Thomas Hobbes in promoting a doctrine of egoism which threatened to render all putative morality a function of morally-compromised selfishness. This accusation comes, in part, from “An Enquiry into the Origin of Moral Virtue” (1723) where Mandeville first proposes his theory of the skillful politician. Whether genuine theory, or more of Mandeville’s playful satirizing, the “Enquiry” was a provocative analysis designed to call into question contemporary notions of virtue. According to Mandeville, skillful politicians originally flattered the masses into believing that actions were vicious when done in order to gratify selfish passions, and virtuous when they were performed in contrast with immediate impulse of nature to acquire private pleasure, by instead suppressing this urge temporarily so as not to offend or harm others. But Mandeville’s central contention was that that no action was virtuous when inspired by selfish emotions. When men learned to temporarily suppress their urges for pleasure, they did not act from virtue. What they really did was find innovative ways to better secure their private pleasures, by engaging in forms of socially-sanctioned behavior they were flattered for- thus securing a more advanced form of pleasure than would be had by simply glorying over their peers in immediate displays of selfishness. Because he considered all natural human passions to be selfish, no action could be virtuous if it was done from a natural impulse which would itself be necessarily selfish. Accordingly, a human could not perform a virtuous act without some form of self-denial. Skillful politicians invented a sort of quasi-morality by which to control naturally selfish men- but because this involved the redirection of natural passion, not active self-denial, at root this was vice. The upshot of Mandeville’s vision was that excepting acts of Christian virtue assisted directly by God, all human actions were vicious and thus morally compromised. Unsurprisingly, this view of human nature was thought to be cynical and degrading, which is why he was often categorized with Hobbes, usually by critics of both, as a proponent of the serious egoist system denying the reality of moral distinctions.

Many critical reactions followed Mandeville’s depiction of humankind as selfish and unruly. He was often understood to deny the reality of virtue, with morality being merely the invention of skillful politicians in order to tame human passions. As Mandeville’s analysis of human nature developed throughout his life, he increasingly placed more emphasis on the peculiarity of human passions. His central estimation is that humankind is filled and predominantly governed by the passion of pride, and even when one seems to be acting contrarily, he or she is doing so out of some form of self-interest. He spends a considerable amount of time satirizing “polite” societies whose members imagine their actions to be entirely benevolent. Statements like “Pride and Vanity have built more Hospitals than all the Virtues together” are used to point out the real motives behind seemingly charitable actions (The Fable, Vol. 1, pg. 294). Pride is central to Mandeville’s analysis because it accounts for human actions performed in order to appear selfless to gain public honor, but which can be made into public benefits. It takes the central role in the skillful politician’s plan to socialize humanity through flattery, offering honor as an ever-renewable prize to anyone who would deny his or her immediate self-interest for the sake of another.

For Mandeville, one problem that arose from this account was over the exact role of skillful politicians in mankind’s societal development. How could it be, if men were only able to please themselves, that some (these skillful politicians) could know enough to control others by instigating a system of social virtues? The second volume of the Fable was written to elucidate difficulties such as these and to explain several things “that were obscure and only hinted at in the First.” (The Fable, Vol. II, pg. vi) To accomplish this task, he fashioned six dialogues between interlocutors Cleomenes, who was an advocate for the Fable, and Horatio, described as one who found great delight in Lord Shaftesbury’s writings. These dialogues provided, among other topics, an explanation of how humankind transitioned from its original state of unrestrained self-pleasing into a complex functioning society. Pride was still central to this analysis, but because of the intricacy and confusion behind such a word as pride, Mandeville introduced a helpful distinction between “self-love” and “self-liking”. Self-liking was identified as the cause of pride and shame and accounted for the human need to gain approval from others, whereas self-love referred to material needs of the body; he asserted that the seeds of politeness were lodged within self-love and self-liking.

In part, this distinction came as response to Joseph Butler who claimed that Mandeville’s version of psychological egoism fell apart upon application. By seeking to reduce the consequences that stemmed from Mandeville’s exposure of the hypocrisy of acting for public benefit, Butler argued the compatibility of self-love and benevolence. He did this by making self-love a general, not a particular passion and in doing so, he made the object of self-love happiness. Happiness, then, would be entirely in the interest of moral subjects. Butler held that self-love was compatible with benevolence because calculating long-term interests led to virtuous action. To Mandeville, however, this avoided the main point by failing to ask the central ethical question: how the distinction between moral and non-moral action can be made if moral acts are indistinguishable from self-interested ones. This second volume of the Fable dismisses many of Butler’s criticisms as ignorant, but Mandeville did realize that his notion of pride needed to be re-conceptualized because it was a loaded term and yet was central to his estimation. According to Mandeville, Butler’s error –leading him to claim Mandeville’s system collapsed incoherently– was failing to recognize that men first had to like themselves, but could only do so through other’s recognition and then approbation. Mandeville upheld that self-love is given to all for self-preservation, but we cannot love what we dislike and so we must genuinely like our own being. He alleged that nature caused us to value ourselves above our real worth and so in order to confirm the good opinions we have of ourselves, we flock together to have these notions affirmed. He wrote, “an untaught Man would desire every body that came near him, to agree with him in the Opinion of his superiour Worth, and be angry, as far as his Fear would let him, with all that should refuse it: He would be highly delighted with, and love every body, whom he thought to have a good Opinion of him” (The Fable, Vol. II, pg. 138-9). So, he thought even in an instance where a group of men was fully fed, within less than a half an hour self-liking would lead to a desire for superiority in some way, be it through strength, cunning, or some other grander quality.

Mandeville thought introducing the distinction between “self-liking” and “self-love” rectified confusions over the role of pride. Humans have a deeply rooted psychological need for approbation, and this can drive us to ensure we truly possess the qualities we admire in others. In fact, he claimed self-liking is so necessary to beings who indulge it that people can taste no pleasure without it. Mandeville gives an example of the extremities of this need­­ by claiming self-liking can even drive one to suicide if he or she fails to receive the approbation of others. Still, Mandeville maintains that because our motivation is for the pleasure of a good opinion of ourselves along with a good reputation, our achievement of virtuous character traits, even if genuinely desired, is not true virtue. The motivation is selfish and, consequently, not virtuous.

A large part of Mandeville’s later work focused on critiquing theorists like Berkeley, Law, and Shaftesbury. He particularly criticized Shaftesbury who claimed that human benevolence was natural and that men could act disinterestedly without regard to pride. Mandeville opposed the search for this objective standard of morality as being no better than “a Wild-Goose-Chace that is little to be depended on” (The Fable, Vol. I, p. 331). He thought that impressing upon people that they could be virtuous without self-denial would be a “vast inlet to hypocrisy,” not only deceiving everyone else, but also themselves (The Fable, Vol. I, p. 331). Mandeville aimed to show that, by using his own rigorous and austere standards of morality, his opponents had never performed a virtuous act in their lives; furthermore, if everyone must live up to these ideals, it would mean the collapse of modern society. Thus by alleging the difficulty of achieving virtue and the usefulness of vice, his paradox seemed to set a trap. Francis Hutcheson took up this debate in defense of Shaftesbury in order to establish an alternate account of human virtue to show how humanity could naturally be virtuous by acting from disinterested benevolence. He found the Fable’s outcome detestable in that it reduced societal virtue to passion and claimed this constituted a comprehensive system of sociability. Hutcheson considered a proper moralist to be one who promoted virtue by demonstrating that it is within one’s own best interest to act virtuously. He argued, by constructing his theory of the moral sense, that virtue was pleasurable and in complete accordance with one’s nature. Still, even with this radical departure from Mandeville’s conclusions, both undoubtedly agreed that reason could not sufficiently supply a standard for action: one must begin with an examination of human nature.

Other philosophers took the Fable in a less outraged and condemnatory fashion than Hutcheson. Instead of agreeing with Mandeville that self-interest negated moral worth and attempting to show that human action could be entirely disinterested, Hume agreed with substantial aspects of his basic analysis, but pointed out that if good things result from vice, then there is something deeply incorrect in retaining the terminology of vice after all. Hume considered Hutcheson’s conclusion— that we give our approvals because we are pleased naturally by the actions we find virtuous— to be incorrect. Hume noted, much like Mandeville, that our sense of duty or morality solely occurs in civilization, and he aligns himself more closely with Mandeville than Hutcheson when accounting for human sociability.

It is, perhaps, through Jean-Jacques Rousseau that Mandeville’s naturalistic account of human sociability found its most important messenger. In 1756, Adam Smith, in his review of Rousseau’s Discourse on the Origins of Inequality remarked how Mandeville’s second volume of the Fable gave occasion to Rousseau’s system. Rousseau and Mandeville both deny the natural sociability of man and equally stress the gradual evolution of society. For Rousseau, mankind was endowed with pity, or a “natural repugnance at seeing any other sensible being and particularly any of our own species, suffer pain or death” (Discourse on the Origins of Inequality). This pity or compassion plays a large part in modifying amour de soi-même (self-respect) and making it humane. He saw this passion as a natural and acknowledged that Mandeville agreed. What Mandeville failed to see, thought Rousseau, was that from this pity came all of the other societal virtues.

Smith was also influenced by Mandeville, but likewise disagreed with the supposition that people are wholly selfish, and his Theory of Moral Sentiments spends considerable time debunking the positions of Hobbes and Mandeville accordingly. Smith was able to circumvent this purely self-interested account by drawing on the role of sympathy. He supposed the whole account of self-interest as found in Hobbes’s and Mandeville’s systems caused such commotion in the world because of misapprehensions on the role of sympathy. Smith determined that an operational system of morals was partly based on its capacity to account for a good theory of fellow feeling. So, for example, Mandeville claimed that one’s motivation to help a beggar on the streets would stem from passions like pity that govern humankind: to walk away from someone in need would raise pity within one’s self in such way as to cause psychological harm, and therefore any help given would be performed in order to relieve the unease of seeing another in suffering.

Smith also considered Mandeville’s claim that humans only associated with one another to receive pleasure from the esteem they sought. While Smith did not wholly accept this, they both agreed about the enticing nature of public praise and that it can, at times, be a more powerful desire than accumulation of money. Smith responds directly to Mandeville on this point in the Theory of Moral Sentiments, paying particular attention to Mandeville’s account of the role of pride. Smith rejects Mandeville’s contention that all public spirit and self-sacrifice are merely clever ways to receive the praise of society. He gets around this by drawing a distinction between the desire to become praise-worthy, which is not vice, and the desire of frivolous praise for anything whatsoever. He claims there is a tricky similarity between the two that has been exaggerated by Mandeville, but the distinction is made by separating vanity from the love of true glory. Both are passions, but one is reasonable while the other is ridiculous. Significantly, though, Smith never lays to rest the importance of motivation to one’s overall actions and acknowledges how there are alternate motivations to act which employ both the role of sympathy and self-interest, e.g., one may donate out of some true feeling from sympathy, all the while knowing the move is socially advantageous. Smith gives some praise to Mandeville’s licentious system, because even though it was ultimately incorrect, it could not have made so much noise in the world if it had not, in some way, bordered upon truth. Smith noted it was because of Mandeville’s clever, yet misplaced analysis of human nature that people began to feel the connection between economic activity and human desire.

5. On Charity

In Mandeville’s “Vindication” of the Fable, he proposed that the reason for its sudden popularity may have been his “An Essay on Charity and Charity-Schools” (1723). In this essay Mandeville took his theory from fable to applied social criticism as he claimed that charity is often mistook for pity and compassion. Pity and compassion, as opposed to charity, can be traced back to a desire to think well of one’s self. This “charity”, then, would not be virtuous action but vicious, and therefore worthy of examination. To say Mandeville was unpopular for writing against the formation of charity schools would be an understatement: charity schools were highly regarded and were the most popular form of benevolence in eighteenth-century England. Initiated near the end of the seventeenth century, they were the predominant form of education for the poor. Donning a charitable temperature, these schools provided ways to impose virtuous qualities into the minds of poor children. The common attitude toward these children was rather derogatory and often depicted them as “rough” because they came from pickpockets, idlers and beggars of society. The curriculum within charity schools was overtly religious, attempting to instill moral and religious habits so as to turn these children into polite members of society.

Bernard Mandeville opposed the formation of charity schools, and while his disagreement may seem harsh, it is a practical example of the kind of hypocrisy he contested. Mandeville challenged the use of the word “charity” in description of these schools, and claimed that they were formed not out of the virtue of charity, but out of the passion of pity. To him, passions like pity are acted upon to relieve one’s own self the unease of seeing another in suffering. He explains that, in order for an action to be virtuous, there must not be an impure motive. Acts performed on behalf of friends and family, or done in order to gain honor and public respect could not be charitable. If charity were reducible to pity, then charity itself would be an undiscriminating universal passion and be of no use to society. To him, charity schools were simply clever manifestations of pride. Beginning the essay with his own rigid definition of charity, Mandeville clearly intended to show that these schools were not worthy to be so entitled.

Mandeville argued pity and compassion were accounted for by human passions, and noted, that though it may seem odd, we are controlled by self-love that drives us to relieve these feelings. He drew a sketch of self-love and pity working together with his beggar example. Imagine a beggar on the streets appeals to you by explaining his situation, showing off his wound in need of medical attention, and then implores you to show virtue for Jesus Christ’s sake by giving him some money. His image raises within you a sense of pity, and you feel compelled to give him money. Mandeville claimed the beggar is a master in this art of capturing pity and makes his marks buy their peace. It is our self-love alone that motivates us to give money to this beggar, which cannot constitute an act of charity.

The part of the “Essay” that would have been truly offensive to those in Mandeville’s time comes when he turns accusations of villainy not to so-called objects of charity but to people with wealth and education. He attacks those of good reputation and claims that the reason they have this good reputation is that they have hidden their private vice behind public benefit. He compared charity schools to a vogue in the fashion of hooped petticoats, and pointed out no reason could be given for either. Moreover, he considered these schools to be pernicious, as they would weaken the established social hierarchies on which the British state depended. Charity schools were fashionable to support, but beyond this, Mandeville found little reason for their continuation.

Mandeville disagreed with the entire motivation behind charity schools, seeing them as nothing but a system where men he most opposed could impart their views onto following generations. Mandeville thought, as was common in his day, that people were born into their life stations and should seek to be content within them. He still considered charity to be necessary at times because the helpless should be looked after, but he believed the model of charity schools would only ever promote laziness in society. This view becomes less cynical when considering his support of economic activity as a solution. Mandeville approved of the growing industry and he saw economic advancements as necessary pieces to advancing civilization because standards were being raised, for example: today’s poor were living like yesterday’s rich. He alleged that British prosperity depended, in part, on exploiting the laboring poor, and so it was not the economic advancement he challenged, but rather the hypocrisy of individuals who thought that by their public benefit, they were advancing society. These citizens were acting out of self-love not charity, and if this could be realized, then instances like charity schools could be given over to the critical examination Mandeville thought they deserved.

6. Influence on Economic Theory

Mandeville’s defense of luxury stands amidst the forefront of economic discussions in the eighteenth century. While he charged that a state founded on selfishness is corrupt, he also showed that society must be based upon that selfishness and that no state can be great without embracing luxury. His argument that luxury was harmless to social (if not personal, spiritual) prosperity and necessary for economic flourishing flew in the face of traditional ascetic moral codes embedded in certain Christian teaching, as well as earlier republican political theory which claimed that luxury rendered a population impotent and corrupted individuals, leading to the internal decay of the polity and its vulnerability to external conquest.

Mandeville’s most prevalent influence on economic theory was through Adam Smith. Both of them by and large supported market-based systems of free resource allocation. Mandeville’s commanding point, which could not be ignored by future economists, was that without indulgence there would be little, if any, consumer spending. Mandeville certainly influenced Smith’s economic thought, as Smith picks up the private vice, public benefit paradox in order to claim that one of the original principles in human nature is to barter and trade for private advantage, which then propels commercial society forward resulting in economic advancement and prosperity. This paradox raised the question of whether self-interested action was vicious, and further proposed that by attending to one’s own needs, one could actually contribute to society in positive ways. In his Wealth of Nations, Smith borrowed largely from Mandeville’s earlier position on the usefulness of self-interested behavior, though he denied the scandalous implications Mandeville provided. It is speculated as to whether Smith inherited his invisible hand notion from the paradox Mandeville presented–although the phrase was never explicitly mentioned in Mandeville’s writing– because Smith mentions the invisible hand when he provides an example of unintended public interest brought about by intending one’s own gain. Influence is also found in the division of labor theory, which was one of Smith’s tenets of modern economic thought.

Most notably, Mandeville’s work contains the genealogical origins of laissez-faire economic theory- in particular as put forward by Friedrich von Hayek, one of the Fable’s keenest twentieth-century admirers. The similarity lies in Mandeville’s claim that self-seeking individuals will interact in mutually beneficial ways without being coordinated from above, while a natural check on their interactions will result in public benefit as the outcome. Interference with this self-seeking will pervert the balance- as alleged in the conclusion of the Grumbling Hive. Because of this notion of order emerging through voluntarily, unregulated activities, Hayek credits Mandeville as being one of the first to put forward the concept of “spontaneous order”. Using the same sort of language, Mandeville remarked, “how the short-sighted Wisdom, of perhaps well-meaning People, may rob us of a Felicity, that would flow spontaneously from the Nature of every large Society, if none were to divert or interrupt the Stream” (The Fable, Vol. II, p. 427). Hayek argued that instead of solely viewing Mandeville through the lens of a moral philosopher, we should see him as a great psychologist who may not have contributed much by way of answers, but certainly asked the right questions using an evolutionary approach to understand society. Hayek even goes so far as to claim that Darwin, in many respects, is the culmination of a development Mandeville started more than any other single person. This approach– rather than assuming society was the product of planning and conscious design by elites– helped spark new empirical explorations. Mandeville saw the sociability of man as arising from two things: the many desires he has, and the opposition met while attempting to satisfy these desires. He brings to the foreground the beneficial effects of luxury, and this was part of what interested John Maynard Keynes. In his General Theory, Keynes cited Mandeville as a source for his position in emphasizing the positive effects of consumption (aggregate demand). This stood in opposition to classical economics who held up production (aggregate supply) as the motor of economic growth.

While there was no systematic formulation of laissez-faire theory in Mandeville’s writing, it was an important literary source for the doctrine, namely, its analysis of human selfishness and the societal benefits ironically and unintentionally stemming therefrom. It is precisely through these attempts to reconcile the paradox of private vices, public benefits that we find some of the first leanings toward a modern utilitarian attitude. Accordingly, Mandeville is thought to be one its most fundamental and early philosophical influences, as transmitted in particular by David Hume and Adam Smith to Jeremy Bentham and then John Stuart Mill.

7. References and Further Reading

Bernard Mandeville was an outspoken and controversial author and an equally interesting character. He claims that he wrote mostly for his own entertainment, but the vast number of essays, poems, and stories he composed should, perhaps, be allowed to speak for themselves. The best modern edition and collection of Mandeville’s work is F.B. Kaye’s The Fable of the Bees. The textual references throughout the article were from Kaye’s Fable through the Online Library of Liberty (1988). The following list of Mandeville’s work is adapted from and indebted to Kaye’s own work on Bernard Mandeville.

a. Works by Mandeville

  • Bernandi a Mandeville de Medicina Oratorio Scholastica. Rotterdam: Typis Regneri Leers, 1685.
  • Disputatio Philosophica de Brutorum Operationibus. Leyden: Apud Abrahamum Elzevier, Academiae Typograph, 1689.
  • Disputatio Medica Inauguralis de Chylosi Vitiata. Leyden: Apud Abrahamum Elzevier, Academiae Typograph, 1691.
  • The Pamphleteers: A Satyr. London, 1703.
  • Some Fables after the Easie and Familiar Method of Monsieur de la Fontaine. London, 1703.
  • Aesop Dress’d; or a Collection of Fables Writ in Familiar Verse. By B. Mandeville, M.D. London: Printed for Richard Wellington, 1704.
  • Typhon: or The Wars Between the Gods and Giants; A Burlesque Poem in Imitation of the Comical Mons. Scarron. London: Printed for J. Pero & S. Illidge, and sold by J. Nutt, 1704.
  • The Grumbling Hive: or, Knaves Turn’d Honest. London: Printed for Sam. Ballard and sold by A. Baldwin, 1705.
  •  The Virgin Unmask’d: or, Female Dialogues Betwixt an Elderly Maiden Lady, and Her Niece, On Several Diverting Discourses on Love, Marriage, Memoirs, and Morals of the Times. London: Sold by J. Morphew & J. Woodward, 1709.
  • A Treatise of the Hypochondriack and Hysterick Passions, Vulgarly call’d the Hypo in Men and Vapours in Women… By B. de Mandeville, M.D. London: Printed for the author, D. Leach, W. Taylor & J. Woodward, 1711.
  • Wishes to a Godson, with Other Miscellany Poems, By B.M. London: Printed for J. Baker, 1712.
  • The Fable of the Bees: or, Private Vices, Publick Benefits. London: Printed for J. Roberts, 1714.
  • The Mischiefs that Ought Justly to be Apprehended from a Whig-Government. London: Printed for J. Roberts, 1714.
  • Free Thoughts on Religion, the Church and National Happiness, By B.M. London: Sold by T. Jauncy & J. Roberts, 1720.
  • A Modest Defence of Publick Stews… by a Layman. London: Printed by A. Moore, 1724.
  • An Enquiry into the Cause of the Frequent Executions at Tyburn… by B. Mandeville, M.D. London: Sold by J. Roberts, 1725.
  • The Fable of the Bees. Part II. By the Author of the First. London: Sold by J. Roberts, 1729.
  • An Enquiry into the Origin of Honour, and the Usefulness of Christianity in War. By the Author of the Fable of the Bees. London: Printed for J. Brotherton, 1732.
  • A Letter to Dion, Occasion’d by his Book call’d Alciphron or The Minute Philosopher. By the Author of the Fable of the Bees. London: Sold by J. Roberts, 1732.

b. Secondary Literature

  • Cook, H. J. “Bernard Mandeville and the Therapy of ‘The Clever Politician’” Journal of the History of Ideas 60 (1999): 101-124.
    • On the clever politicians’ manipulation of people’s passions to make politics run smoothly.
  • Goldsmith, M.M. Private Vices, Public Benefits: Bernard Mandeville’s Social and Political Thought. Christchurch, New Zealand: Cybereditions Corporation, 2001.
    • A helpful monograph of Mandeville’s ideas placed in context of eighteenth-century England’s political atmosphere.
  • Hayek, F.A. The Trend of Economic Thinking: Essays on Political Economists and Economic History Volume III. Taylor & Francis e-Library, 2005.
    • See Hayek’s chapter 6 devoted to what he sees as two important Mandevillean contributions to the history of economics.
  • Heath, E. “Mandeville’s Bewitching Engine of Praise” History of Philosophy Quarterly 15 (1998): 205-226.
    • Offers Mandeville’s account of human nature and how government arises from a state of nature. Also depicts Mandeville as one of the first defenders of commercial modernity.
  • Hont, I. “The early Enlightenment debate on commerce and luxury” The Cambridge History of Eighteenth-Century Political Thought. 1st ed. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press (2006): 377-418.
    • See especially pages 387-395 for a discussion of Mandeville’s place in the luxury debate.
  • Hundert, E.J. The Enlightenment’s Fable: Bernard Mandeville and the Discovery of Society. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1994.
    • A comprehensive book which examines the strategies of Mandeville’s ideas and sources and how they lent to his eighteenth-century influence.
  • Hundert, E.J. The Fable of the Bees: And Other Writings. Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Company, Inc., 1997.
    • An anthology with a wonderful, short introduction to Mandeville.
  • Jones, M.G. The Charity School Movement: A Study of Eighteenth Century Puritanism in Action. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1938.
    • A valuable study, especially helpful in understanding the context of Mandeville’s “An Essay on Charity and Charity-Schools”.
  • Kaye, F.B. Commentary and Introduction to The Fable of the Bees, 2 Volumes. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1924.
    • The best modern edition and collection of The Fable along with an introduction to Mandeville’s work.
  • Kaye, F.B. “The Writings of Bernard Mandeville: A Bibliographical Survey” The Journal of English and Germanic Philology 20 (1921): 419-467.
    • A scholarly survey of Mandeville’s writings.
  • Kerkhof, B. “A fatal attraction? Smith’s ‘Theory of moral sentiments’ and Mandeville’s ‘Fable’” History of Political Thought 16 no. 2 (1995): 219-233
    • A helpful article on Mandeville’s distinction between “self-liking” and “self-love”
  • Malcom, J. “One State of Nature: Mandeville and Rousseau” Journal of the History of Ideas 39 no. 1 (1978): 119-124.
    • A piece exploring the similarities between Mandeville and Rousseau’s state of nature and process of human sociability.
  • Primer, I. (ed.), Mandeville Studies: New Explorations in the Art and Thought of Dr. Bernard Mandeville (1670-1733). The Hague: Nijhoff, 1975.
    • A collection of various articles, including pieces on some of Mandeville’s minor writings and his relation to specific writers, such as: Defoe, Shaftesbury and Voltaire.
  • Primer, I. The Fable of the Bees Or Private Vices, Publick Benefits. New York: Capricorn Books, 1962.
    • A helpful edited edition good for a basic overview of Mandeville’s thought- complete with an introduction.
  • Runciman, D. Political Hypocrisy: The Mask of Power, from Hobbes to Orwell and Beyond. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 2008.
    • In chapter 2 the author proposes two types of hypocrisy present in Mandeville’s analysis and demonstrates how, to Mandeville, certain kinds of hypocrisy are necessary whilst others are detestable.
  • Welchman, J. “Who Rebutted Bernard Mandeville?” History of Philosophy Quarterly 24 No. 1 (2007): 57-74.
    • On Mandeville and some of his moral interlocutors. It presents several attempts to rebut Mandeville made by Hutcheson, Butler, Berkeley, Hume, and Smith.


Author Information

Phyllis Vandenberg
Grand Valley State University
U. S. A.


Abigail DeHart
Grand Valley State University
U. S. A.

Mou Zongsan (Mou Tsung-san) (1909—1995)

Mou ZongsanMou Zongsan (Mou Tsung-san) is a sophisticated and systematic example of a modern Chinese philosopher. A Chinese nationalist, he aimed to reinvigorate traditional Chinese philosophy through an encounter with Western (and especially German) philosophy and to restore it to a position of prestige in the world. In particular, he engaged closely with Immanuel Kant’s three Critiques and attempted to show, pace Kant, that human beings possess intellectual intuition, a supra-sensible mode of knowledge that Kant reserved to God alone. He assimilated this notion of intellectual intuition to ideas found in Confucianism, Buddhism, and Daoism and attempted to expand it into a metaphysical system that would establish the objectivity of moral values and the possibility of sagehood.

Mou’s Collected Works run to thirty-three volumes and extend to history of philosophy, logic, epistemology, ontology, metaethics, philosophy of history, and political philosophy.  His corpus is an unusual hybrid in that although its main aim is to erect a metaphysical system, many of the books where Mou pursues that end consist largely of cultural criticism or histories of Confucian, Buddhist, or Daoist philosophy in which Mou explains his own opinions through exegesis of other thinkers’ in a terminology appropriated from Kant, Tiantai Buddhism, and Neo-Confucianism.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Cultural Thought
    1. Chinese Philosophy and the Chinese Nation
    2. Development of Chinese Philosophy
    3. History of Chinese Philosophy: Confucianism, Buddhism, and Daoism
  3. Metaphysical Thought
    1. Intellectual Intuition and Things-in-Themselves
    2. Two-Level Ontology
    3. Perfect Teaching
  4. Criticisms
  5. Influence
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Biography

Mou was born in 1909, at the very end of China’s imperial era, into the family of a rural innkeeper who admired Chinese classical learning, which the young Mou came to share. At just that time, however, traditional Chinese learning was being denigrated by some of the intellectual elite, who searched frantically for something to replace it due to fears that their own tradition was dangerously impotent against modern nation-states armed with Western science, technology, bureaucracy, and finance.

In 1929, Mou enrolled in Peking (Beijing) University’s department of philosophy. He embarked on a deep study of Russell and Whitehead’s Principia Mathematica (then a subject of great interest in Chinese philosophical circles ) and also of Whitehead’s Process and Reality. However, Mou was also led by his interest in Whiteheadian process thought to read voraciously in the pre-modern literature on the Yijing (I Ching or Book of Changes), and his classical tastes made him an oddball at Peking University, which was vigorously modernist and anti-traditional.  Mou would have been a lonely figure there had he not met Xiong Shili in his junior year. Xiong was just making his name as a nationally known apologist for traditional Chinese philosophy and mentored Mou for years afterward.   The two men remained close until Mou later left the mainland. Mou graduated from Peking University in 1933 and moved around the country unhappily from one short-term teaching job to another owing to frequent workplace personality conflicts and fighting between the Chinese government and both Japanese and Communist forces. Despite these peregrinations, Mou wrote copiously on logic and epistemology and also on the Yijing.  Mou hated the Communists very boisterously and when they took over China in 1949 he moved to Taiwan and spent the next decade teaching and writing in a philosophical vein about the history and future of Chinese political thought and culture. In 1960, once again unhappy with his colleagues, Mou was invited by his friend Tang Junyi, also a student of Xiong, to leave Taiwan for academic employment in Hong Kong.  There, Mou’s work took a decisive turn and entered what he later considered its mature stage, yielding the books which established him as a key figure in modern Chinese philosophy. During the next thirty-five years he published seven major monographs (one running to three volumes), together with translations of all three of Immanuel Kant’s Critiques and many more volumes’ worth of articles, lectures, and occasional writings. Mou officially retired from the Chinese University of Hong Kong in 1974 but continued to teach and lecture in Hong Kong and Taiwan until his death in 1995.

We can divide Mou’s expansive thought into two closely related parts which we might call his “cultural” thought, about the history and destiny of Chinese culture, and his “metaphysical” thought, concerning the problems and doctrines of Chinese philosophy, which Mou thought of as the essence of Chinese culture.

2. Cultural Thought

a. Chinese Philosophy and the Chinese Nation

Like most intellectuals of his generation, Mou was a nationalist and saw his work as a way to strengthen the Chinese nation and return it to a place of greatness in the world.

Influenced by Hegel, Mou thought of the history and culture of the Chinese nation as an organic whole,, with a natural and knowable course of development. He thought that China’s political destiny depended ultimately on its philosophy, and in turn blamed China’s conquest by the Manchus in 1644, and again by the Communists in 1949, on its loss of focus on the Neo-Confucianism of the Song through Ming dynasties (960-1644)He hoped his own work would help to re-kindle China’s commitment to Confucianism and thereby help defeat Communism.

Along with many of his contemporaries, Mou was interested in why China never gave rise its own Scientific Revolution like that in the West, and also in articulating what the strengths were in China’s intellectual history whereby it outstripped the West. Mou phrased his answer to these two questions in terms of “inner sagehood” (neisheng) and “outer kingship” (waiwang). By “inner sagehood,” Mou meant the cultivation of moral conduct and outlook—at which he thought Confucianism was unequalled in the world—and he used “outer kingship” to encompass political governancealong with other ingredients in the welfare of society, such as a productive economy and scientific and technological know-how. Mou thought that China’s classical tradition was historically weak in the theory and practice of “outer kingship,” and he believed that Chinese culture would have to transform itself thoroughly by discovering in its indigenous learning the resources with which to develop traditions of science and democracy.

For the last thirty years of his life, all of Mou’s writings were part of a conversation with Immanuel Kant, whom he considered the greatest Western philosopher and the one most useful for exploring Confucian “moral metaphysics.” Throughout that half of his career, Mou’s books quoted Kant extensively (sometimes for pages at a time) and appropriated Kantian terms into the service of his reconstructed Confucianism. Scholars agree widely that Mou altered the meanings of these terms significantly when he moved them from Kant’s system into his own, but opinions vary about just how conscious Mou was that he had done so.

b. Development of Chinese Philosophy

As an apologist for Chinese philosophy, Mou was anxious to show that its genius extended to almost all areas and epochs of Chinese philosophy. To this end, He wrote extensively about the history of Chinese philosophy and highlighted the important contributions of Daoist and Buddhist philosophy, along with their harmonious interaction with Confucian philosophy in the dialectical unfolding and refinement of Chinese philosophy in each age.

Before China was united under the Qin dynasty (221-206 BCE), Mou believed, Chinese culture gave definitive form to the ancient philosophical inheritance of the late Zhou dynasty (771-221 BCE), culminating in the teachings of Confucius and Mencius. These were still epigrammatic rather systematic, but Mou thought that they already contained the essence of later Chinese philosophy in germinal form. The next great phase of development came in the Wei-Jin period (265-420 CE) with the assimilation of “Neo-Daoism” or xuanxue (literally “dark” or “mysterious learning”), from whence came the first formal articulation of the “perfect teaching” (concerning which see below). Shortly afterward, Mou taught, Chinese culture experienced its first great challenge from abroad, in the form of Buddhist philosophy. In the Sui and Tang dynasties (589-907) it was the task of Chinese philosophy to “digest” or absorb Buddhist philosophy into itself. In the process, it gave birth to indigenous Chinese schools of Buddhist philosophy (most notably Huayan and Tiantai), which Mou believed advanced beyond the Indian schools because they agreed with essential tenets of native Chinese philosophy, such as the teaching that all people are endowed with an innately sagely nature.

On Mou’s account, in the Song through Ming dynasties (960-1644) Confucianism underwent a second great phase of development and reasserted itself as the true and proper leader of Chinese culture and philosophy. However, at the end of the Ming, there occurred what Mou taught was an alien irruption into Chinese history by the Manchus, who thwarted the “natural” course of China’s cultural unfolding. In the thinking of late Ming philosophers such as Huang Zongxi (1610-1695), Gu Yanwu (1613-1682), and Wang Fuzhi (1619-1692), Mou thought that China had been poised to give rise to its own new forms of “outer kingship” which would have eventuated in an indigenous birth of science and democracy in China, enabling China to compete with the modern West. Chinese culture, however. was diverted from that healthy course of development by the intrusion of the Manchus. Mou believed that it was this diversion which made China vulnerable to the Communist takeover of the 20th century by alienating it from its own philosophical tradition.

Mou preached that the mission of modern Chinese philosophy was to achieve a mutually beneficial conciliation with Western philosophy. Inspired by the West’s example, China would appropriate science and democracy into its native tradition, and the West in turn would benefit from China’s unparalleled expertise in “inner sagehood,” typified especially by its “perfect teaching.”

However, throughout Mou’s lifetime, he remained unimpressed with the actual state of contemporary Chinese philosophy. He seldom rated any contemporary Chinese thinkers as worthy of the name “philosopher,” and he mentioned Chinese Marxist thought only rarely and only as a force entirely antipathetic to true Chinese philosophy.

c. History of Chinese Philosophy: Confucianism, Buddhism, and Daoism

In his historical writings on Confucianism, Mou is most famous for his thesis of the “three lineages” (san xi). Whereas Neo-Confucians where traditionally grouped into a “School of Principle” represented chiefly by Zhu Xi (1130-1200) and a “School of Mind” associated with Lu Xiangshan (1139-1192) and Wang Yangming (1472-1529), Mou also recognized a third lineage exemplified by lesser-known figures as Hu Hong (Hu Wufeng) (1105-1161) and Liu Jishan (Liu Zongzhou) (1578-1645).

Mou judged this third lineage to be the true representatives of Confucian orthodoxy. He criticized Zhu Xi, conventionally regarded as the authoritative synthesizer of Neo-Confucian doctrine, as a usurper who despite good intentions depicted heavenly principle (tianli) in an excessively transcendent way that was foreign to the ancient Confucian message. On Mou’s view, that message is one of paradoxical “immanent transcendence” (neizai chaoyue), in which heavenly principle and human nature are only lexically distinct from each other, not substantially separate. It was because Mou believed that the Hu-Liu lineage of Neo-Confucianism expressed this paradoxical relationship most accurately and artfully that that he ranked it the highest or “perfect” (yuan) expression of Confucian philosophy. (See “Perfect Teaching” below.)

Because Mou wanted to revalorize the whole Chinese philosophical tradition, and not just its Confucian wing, he also wrote extensively on Chinese Buddhist philosophy. He maintained that Indian Buddhist philosophy had remained limited and flawed until in migrated to Chinawhere it was leavened with what Mou saw as core principles of indigenous Chinese philosophy, such as a belief in the basic goodness of both human nature and the world. From Chinese Buddhist thought he adopted methodological ideas that he later applied to his own system. One of these was “doctrinal classification” (panjiao), a doxographic technique of reading competing philosophical systems as forming a dialectical progression of closer and closer approximations to a “perfect teaching” (yuanjiao), rather than as mutually incompatible contenders. Much as Mou discovered what he thought of as the highest expression of Confucian doctrine in the largely forgotten thinkers of the Hu-Liu lineage, he found what he thought of as their formal analog and philosophical precursor in the relatively obscure Tiantai school of Buddhism and its thesis of the identity of enlightenment and delusion.

Mou wrote far less about Daoism than Confucianism or Buddhism, but at least in principle he regarded it too as an indispensible part of the Chinese philosophical heritage. Mou focused most on the “Inner Chapters” (neipian) of the Zhuangzi, especially the “Wandering Beyond” (Xiaoyao you) and “Discussion on Smoothing Things Out”(Qi wu lun) and the writings of Wei-Jin commentators Guo Xiang (c. 252-312 CE) and Wang Bi (226-249 CE). Mou saw the Wei-Jin idea of “root and traces” (ji ben) in particular as an early forerunner of Tiantai Buddhist thinking central to its concept of the “perfect teaching.”

3. Metaphysical Thought

In his metaphysical writings, Mou was mainly interested in how moral value is able to exist and how people are able to know it. Mou hoped to show that humans can directly know moral value and indeed that such knowledge amounts to knowledge par excellence. In an inversion of one of Kant’s terms, he called this project “moral metaphysics” (daode de xingshangxue), meaning a metaphysics in which moral value is ontically primary. That is, a moral metaphysics considers that the central ontological fact is that moral value exists and is known or “intuited” by us more directly than anything else. Mou believed that Chinese philosophy alone has generated the necessary insights for constructing such a moral metaphysics, whereas Kant (who represented for Mou the summit of Western philosophy) did not understand moral knowing because, fixated on theoretical and speculative knowledge, he wrong-headedly applied the same transcendentalism that Mou found so masterful in the Critique of Pure Reason (which supposes that we know a thing not directly but only through the distorting lenses of our mental apparatus) to moral matters, where it is completely out of place.

a. Intellectual Intuition and Things-in-Themselves

For many, the most striking thing about Mou’s philosophy (and the hardest to accept) is his conviction that human beings possess “intellectual intuition” (zhi de zhijue), a direct knowledge of reality without resort to the senses and without overlaying such sensory forms and cognitive categories as time, space, number, and cause and effect.

As with most of the terms that Mou borrowed from Kant, he attached a much different meaning to ‘intellectual intuition.’   For Kant, intellectual intuition was a capacity belonging to God alone. However, Mou thought this was Kant’s greatest mistake and concluded that one of the great contributions of Chinese philosophy to the world was a unanimous belief that humans have intellectual intuition. In the context of Chinese philosophy he took ‘intellectual intuition’ as an umbrella term for the various Confucian, Buddhist, and Daoist concepts of a supra-mundane sort of knowing that, when perfected, makes its possessor a sage or a buddha.

On Mou’s analysis, though Confucian, Buddhist, and Daoist philosophers call intellectual intuition by different names and theorize it differently, they agree that it is available to everyone, that it transcends subject-object duality, and that it is higher than, and prior to, the dualistic knowledge which comes through the “sensible intuition” of seeing and hearingoften called “empirical” (jingyan) or “grasping” (zhi) knowledge in Mou’s terminology. However, Mou taught that the Confucian understanding of intellectual intuition (referred to by a variety of names such as ren, “benevolence,” or liangzhi, “innate moral knowing”) is superior to the Buddhist and Daoist conceptions because it recognizes that intellectual intuition is essentially moral and creative.

Mou thought that people regularly manifest intellectual intuition in everyday life in the form of morally correct impulses and behaviors. To use the classic Mencian example, if we see a child about to fall down a well, we immediately feel alarm. For Mou, this sudden upsurge of concern is an occurrence of intellectual intuition, spontaneous and uncaused. Furthermore, Mou endorsed what he saw as the Confucian doctrine that it is this essentially moral intellectual intuition that “creates” or “gives birth to the ten thousand things” (chuangsheng wanwu) by conferring on them moral value.

b. Two-Level Ontology

Through our capacity for intellectual intuition, Mou taught, human beings are “finite yet infinite” (youxian er wuxian). He accepted Kant’s system as a good analysis of our finite aspect, which is to say our experience as beings who are limited in space and time and also in understanding, but he also thought that in our exercise of intellectual intuition we transcend our finitude as well.

Accordingly, Mou went to great pains to explain how the world of sensible objects and the realm of noumenal objects, or objects of intellectual intuition, are related to each other in a “two-level ontology” (liangceng cunyoulun) inspired by the Chinese Buddhist text The Awakening of Faith. In this model, all of reality is said to consist of mind, but a mind which has two aspects (yixin ermen). As intellectual intuition, mind directly knows things-in-themselves, without mediation by forms and categories and without the illusion that things-in-themselves are truly separate from mind. This upper level of the two-level ontology is what Mou labels “ontology without grasping” (wuzhi cunyoulun), once again choosing a term of Buddhist inspiration. However, mind also submits itself to forms and categories in a process that Mou calls “self-negation” (ziwo kanxian). Mind at this lower level, which Mou terms the “cognitive mind” (renzhi xin), employs sensory intuition and associated cognitive processes to apprehend things as discrete objects, separate from each other and from mindhaving location in time and space, numerical identity, and causal and other relations. This lower ontological level is what Mou calls “ontology with grasping” (zhi de cunyoulun).

c. Perfect Teaching

On Mou’s view, all of the many types of Chinese philosophy he studied taught some version of this doctrine of intellectual intuition, things-in-themselves, and phenomena, and he considered it important to explain how he adjudicated among these many broadly similar strains of philosophy. To that end, he borrowed from Chinese Buddhist scholasticism the concept of a “perfect teaching” (yuanjiao) and the practice of classifying teachings (panjiao) doxographically in order to rank them from less to more “perfect” or complete.

A perfect teaching, in Mou’s sense of the term, is distinguished from a penultimate one not by its content (which is the same in either case) but by its rhetorical form. Specifically, a perfect teaching is couched in the form of a paradox (guijue). In Mou’s opinion, all good examples of Chinese philosophy acknowledge the commonsense difference between subject and object but also teach that we can transcend that difference through the exercise of intellectual intuition. But what distinguishes a perfect teaching is that it makes a show of flatly asserting, in a way supposed to surprise the listener, that subject and object are simply identical to one another, without qualification.

Mou developed this formal concept of a perfect teaching from the example offered by Tiantai Buddhist philosophyHe then applied it to the history of Confucian thoughtidentifying what he thought of as a Confucian equivalent to the Tiantai perfect teaching in the writings of Cheng Hao (1032-1085), Hu Hong, and Liu Jishan. Though Mou believed that all three families of Confucian philosophy—Confucian, Buddhist, and Daoist—had their own versions of a perfect teaching, he rated the Confucian perfect teaching more highly than the Buddhist or Daoist ones, for it gives an account of the “morally creative” character of intellectual intuition, which he thought essential. In the Confucian perfect teaching, he taught, intellectual intuition is said to “morally create” the cosmos in the sense that it gives order to chaos by making moral judgments and thereby endowing everything in existence with moral significance.

Mou claimed that the perfect teaching was a unique feature of Chinese philosophy and reckoned this a valuable contribution to world philosophy because, in his opinion, only a perfect teaching supplied an answer to what he called the problem of the “summum bonum” (yuanshan) or “coincidence of virtue and happiness” (defu yizhi), that is, the problem of how it can be assured that a person of virtue will necessarily be rewarded with happiness. He noted that in Kant’s philosophy (and, in his opinion, throughout the rest of Western philosophy too) there could be no such assurance that virtue would be crowned with happiness except to hope that God would make it so in the afterlife. By contrast, Mou was proud to say, Chinese philosophy provides for this “coincidence of virtue and happiness” without having to posit either a God or an afterlife. The argument for that assurance differed in Confucian, Buddhist, and Daoist versions of the perfect teaching, but in each case it consisted of a doctrine that intellectual intuition (equivalent to “virtue”) necessarily entails the existence of the phenomenal world (which Mou construed as the meaning of “happiness”), without being contingent on God’s intervention in this world or the next or on any condition other than the operation of intellectual intuition, which Mou considered available to all people at all times.

In arguing for the historical absence of such a solution to the problem of the perfect good anywhere outside of China, Mou did acknowledge that Epicurean and Stoic philosophers also tried to establish that virtue resulted in happiness, but he claimed that their explanations only worked by redefining either virtue or happiness in order to reduce its meaning to something analytically entailed by the other. However, some critics have argued that Mou’s alternative commits the same fault by effectively collapsing happiness into virtue.

4. Criticisms

Mou has often been accused of irrationalism due to his doctrine of the direct, supra-sensory intellectual intuition, which states that people can apprehend the deeper reality underlying the mere phenomena that are measured and described by scientific knowledge. Mou has also been ridiculed because he did not so much present positive arguments in favor of his main metaphysical beliefs as propound them as definitive facts, presumably known to him through a privileged access to sagely intuition.

Critics also frequently question the relevance of Mou’s philosophy, both to the Confucian tradition from which he took his inspiration, as well as to Chinese society. They point out that Mou’s thought (as well as that of other inheritors of Xiong Shili’s legacy in general) inhabits a far different social context than the Confucian tradition with which he identifies. With Mou and his generation, Chinese philosophy was detached from its old homes in the traditional schools of classical learning (shuyuan), the Imperial civil service, and monasteries and hermitages, and was transplanted into the new setting of the modern university, with its disciplinary divisions and limited social role. Critics point to this academicization as evidence that, despite Mou’s aspirations to kindle a massive revival of the Confucian spirit in China, his thought risks being little more than a “lost soul,” deracinated and intellectualized. The first problem with this, they claim, is that Mou reduces Confucianism to a philosophy in the modern academic sense and leaves out other important aspects of the pre-modern Confucian cultural system, such as its art, literature, and ritual and its political and career institutions. Second, they claim, because Mou’s brand of Confucianism accents metaphysics so heavily, it remains confined to departments of philosophy and powerless to exert any real influence over Chinese society.

Mou has also been criticized for his explicit essentialism. In keeping with his Hegelian tendency, he presented China as consisting essentially of Chinese culture, and even more particularly with Chinese philosophy, and he claimed in turn that this is epitomized by Confucian philosophy.  Furthermore, he presents the Confucian tradition as consisting essentially of an idiosyncratic-looking list of Confucian thinkers. Opponents complain that even if there were good reasons for Mou to enshrine his handful of favorite Confucians as the very embodiment of all of Chinese culture, this would remain Mou’s opinion and nothing more, a mere interpretation rather than the objective, factual historical insight that Mou claimed it was.

5. Influence

In Mou’s last decades, he began to be recognized together with other prominent students of Xiong Shili as a leader of what came to be called the “New Confucian” (dangdai xin rujia) movement, which aspires to revive and modernize Confucianism as a living spiritual tradition. Through his many influential protégés, Mou achieved great influence over the agenda of contemporary Chinese philosophy.

Two of his early students, Liu Shu-hsien (b. 1934)  and Tu Wei-ming (b. 1940) have been especially active in raising the profile of contemporary Confucianism in English-speaking venues, as has the Canadian-born scholar John Berthrong (b. 1946). Mou’s emphasis on Kant’s transcendental analytic gave new momentum to research on Kant and post-Kantians, particularly in the work of Mou’s student Lee Ming-huei (b. 1953), and his writings on Buddhism lie behind much of the interest in and interpretation of Tiantai philosophy among Chinese scholars. Finally, Mou functions as the main modern influence on, and point of reference for, the intense research on Confucianism among mainland Chinese philosophers today.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Angle, Stephen C. Sagehood: The Contemporary Significance of Neo-Confucian Philosophy. New York: Oxford University Press, 2009.
  • Angle, Stephen C. Contemporary Confucian Political Philosophy. Cambridge: Polity, 2012.
  • Asakura, Tomomi. “On Buddhistic Ontology: A Comparative Study of Mou Zongsan and Kyoto School Philosophy.” Philosophy East and West 61/4 (October 2011): 647-678.
  • Berthrong, John. “The Problem of Mind: Mou Tsung-san's Critique of Chu Hsi." Journal of Chinese Religion 10 (1982): 367-394.
  • Berthrong, John. All Under Heaven. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1994.
  • Billioud, Sébastien. “Mou Zongsan's Problem with the Heideggerian Interpretation of Kant.” Journal of Chinese Philosophy 33/2 (June 2006): 225-247.
  • Billioud, Sébastien. Thinking through Confucian Modernity: A Study of Mou Zongsan's Moral Metaphysics. Leiden and Boston: Brill, 2011.
  • Bresciani, Umberto. Reinventing Confucianism: The New Confucian Movement. Taipei: Taipei Ricci Institute for Chinese Studies, 2001.
  • Bunnin, Nicholas. “God's Knowledge and Ours: Kant and Mou Zongsan on Intellectual Intuition.” Journal of Chinese Philosophy 35/4 (December 2008): 613-624.
  • Chan, N. Serina. “What is Confucian and New about the Thought of Mou Zongsan?” in New Confucianism: A Critical Examination, ed. John Makeham (New York: Palgrave Macmillan, 2003), 131-164.
  • Chan, N. Serina. The Thought of Mou Zongsan. Leiden and Boston: Brill, 2011.
  • Chan, Wing-Cheuk. “Mou Zongsan on Zen Buddhism.” Dao: A Journal of Comparative Philosophy 5/1 (2005) : 73-88.
  • Chan, Wing-Cheuk. “Mou Zongsan's Transformation of Kant's Philosophy.” Journal of Chinese Philosophy 33/1 (March 2006): 125-139.
  • Chan, Wing-Cheuk. “Mou Zongsan and Tang Junyi on Zhang Zai's and Wang Fuzhi's Philosophies of Qi : A Critical Reflection.” Dao: A Journal of Comparative Philosophy 10/1 (March 2011): 85-98.
  • Chan, Wing-Cheuk. “On Mou Zongsan's Hermeneutic Application of Buddhism.” Journal of Chinese Philosophy 38/2 (June 2011): 174-189.
  • Chan, Wing-Cheuk and Henry C. H. Shiu. “Introduction: Mou Zongsan and Chinese Buddhism.” Journal of Chinese Philosophy 38/2 (June 2011): 169-173.
  • Clower, Jason. The Unlikely Buddhologist: Tiantai Buddhism in the New Confucianism of Mou Zongsan. Leiden and Boston: Brill, 2010.
  • Clower, Jason. “Mou Zongsan on the Five Periods of the Buddha's Teaching. Journal of Chinese Philosophy 38/2 (June 2011): 190-205.
  • Guo Qiyong. “Mou Zongsan’s View of Interpreting Confucianism by ‘Moral Autonomy’.” Frontiers of Philosophy in China 2/3 (June 2007): 345-362.
  • Kantor, Hans-Rudolf. “Ontological Indeterminacy and Its Soteriological Relevance: An Assessment of Mou Zongsan's (1909-1995) Interpretation of Zhiyi's (538-597) Tiantai Buddhism.” Philosophy East and West 56/1 (January 2006): 16-68.
  • Kwan, Chun-Keung. “Mou Zongsan’s Ontological Reading of Tiantai Buddhism.” Journal of Chinese Philosophy 38/2 (June 2011): 206-222.
  • Lin, Chen-kuo. “Dwelling in Nearness to the Gods: The Hermeneutical Turn from MOU Zongsan to TU Weiming.” Dao 7 (2008): 381-392.
  • Lin, Tongqi and Zhou Qin. “The Dynamism and Tension in the Anthropocosmic Vision of Mou Zongsan.” Journal of Chinese Philosophy 22/4 (December 1995): 401-440.
  • Liu, Shu-hsien. “Mou Tsung-san (Mou Zongsan)” in Encyclopedia of Chinese Philosophy, ed. A.S. Cua. New York: Routledge, 2003.
  • Mou, Tsung-san [Mou Zongsan]. “The Immediate Successor of Wang Yang-ming: Wang Lung-hsi and his Theory of Ssu-wu.” Philosophy East and West 23/1-2 (1973): 103-120.
  • Neville, Robert C. Boston Confucianism: Portable Tradition in the Late-Modern World. Albany: State University of New York Press, 2000.
  • Stephan Schmidt. “Mou Zongsan, Hegel, and Kant: The Quest for Confucian Modernity.” Philosophy East and West 61/2 (April 2011): 260-302.
  • Shiu, Henry C.H. “Nonsubstantialism of the Awakening of Faith in Mou Zongsan.” Journal of Chinese Philosophy 38/2 (June 2011): 223-237.
  • Tang, Andres Siu-Kwong. “Mou Zongsan’s ‘Transcendental’ Interpretation of Huayan Buddhism.” Journal of Chinese Philosophy 38/2 (June 2011): 238-256.
  • Tu, Wei-ming. Centrality and Commonality: An Essay on Confucian Religiousness. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1989.
  • Tu, Xiaofei. “Dare to Compare: The Comparative Philosophy of Mou Zongsan.” Kritike 1/2 (December 2007): 24-35.
  • Zheng Jiadong. “Mou Zongsan and the Contemporary Circumstances of the Rujia.” Contemporary Chinese Thought 36/2 (Winter 2004-5): 67-88.
  • Zheng Jiadong. “Between History and Thought: Mou Zongsan and the New Confucianism That Walked Out of History.” Contemporary Chinese Thought 36/2 (Winter 2004-5): 49-66.

Author Information

Jason Clower
California State University, Chico
U. S. A.

Jean Bodin (c. 1529—1596)

bodinThe humanist philosopher and jurist Jean Bodin was one of the most prominent political thinkers of the sixteenth century. His reputation is largely based on his account of sovereignty which he formulated in the Six Books of the Commonwealth. Bodin lived at a time of great upheaval, when France was ravaged by the wars of religion between the Catholics and the Huguenots. He was convinced that peace could be restored only if the sovereign prince was given absolute and indivisible power of the state. Bodin believed that different religions could coexist within the commonwealth. His tolerance in religious matters has often been emphasized. He was also one of the first men to have opposed slavery.

Bodin was extremely erudite, and his works discuss a wide variety of topics, extending from natural philosophy and religion to education, political economy, and historical methodology. Natural philosophy and religion where intimately correlated for Bodin. Furthermore, he sought to reform the judicial system of France, and he formulated one of the earliest versions of the quantitative theory of money. Bodin held a superstitious belief about the existence of angels and demons; his works cover topics such as demonology and witchcraft, and include extensive passages on astrology and numerology.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Career
  2. Method for the Easy Comprehension of History
    1. Methodology for the Study of History
    2. Theory of Climates
  3. The Six Bookes of a Commonweale
    1. Concept of Sovereignty
    2. Definition of Law
    3. Limitations upon the Authority of the Sovereign Prince
    4. Difference between Form of State and Form of Government
    5. The Question of Slavery
  4. Bodin’s Economic Thought
    1. Quantitative Theory of Money
    2. The State’s Finances and the Question of Taxation and Property Rights
  5. Writings Concerning Religion
    1. Colloquium heptaplomeres and the Question of Religious Tolerance
    2. The Question of True Religion and Bodin’s Personal Faith
  6. On Witchcraft
  7. Natural Philosophy
  8. Other Works
    1. Juris universi distributio
    2. Moral Philosophy
    3. Writings on Education
    4. Bodin’s Surviving Correspondence
  9. Influence
  10. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
      1. Modern Editions of Bodin’s works
        1. Collected Works
        2. Individual Works
    2. Secondary Sources
      1. Bibliography
      2. Conference Proceedings and Article Collections

1. Life and Career

Jean Bodin’s last will and testament, dated 7th June 1596, states that he was 66 years old when he died. He was therefore born in either 1529 or 1530, the youngest of seven children, four of whom were girls. Bodin’s father, Guillaume Bodin, was a wealthy merchant and a member of the bourgeoisie of Angers. Very little is known of his mother beyond that her name was Catherine Dutertre and that she died before the year 1561.

Bodin joined the Carmelite brotherhood at an early age. Surviving documents tell us that he was released from his vows a few years later. He is known to have studied, and later, taught law at the University of Toulouse during the 1550s. Bodin was unable to obtain a professorship at the university, and this may have driven him away from Toulouse and academic life. During the 1560s, he worked as an advocate at the Parlement of Paris.

Bodin’s first major work, the Method for the Easy Understanding of History (Methodus ad facilem historiarum cognitionem) was published in 1566, the same year that saw the death of his father. Bodin’s most famous work, the Six Books of the Commonwealth (Six livres de la République) was published ten years later, in 1576. In 1570, Bodin was commissioned by the French King Charles IX for the reformation of forest tenures in Normandy. He was at the very heart of French political power in the 1570s – first during the reign of Charles IX and also, after Charles’ death in 1574, during the reign of his brother, Henri III. In 1576, Bodin lost the favor of King Henri III after he opposed, among other things, the king’s fiscal policies during the States General of Blois where Bodin served as representative for the third estate of Vermandois.

Bodin settled in Laon during the last two decades of his life. He had moved there shortly after marrying the widow of a Laon official, Françoise Trouilliart (or Trouillard) in 1576. Bodin sought employment with the Duke of Alençon, the king’s youngest brother. The duke aspired to marry Queen Elizabeth of England. During one of the duke’s trips to London, Bodin accompanied him. In 1582, Bodin followed Alençon to Antwerp, where Alençon sided with the Low Countries in their revolt against Spain. Bodin was appointed Master of Requests and counselor (maître des requêtes et conseiller) to the duke in 1583. He retired from national politics after Alençon’s sudden death in 1584. Following the death of his brother-in-law, Bodin succeeded him in office as procureur du roi, or Chief Public Prosecutor, for Laon in 1587.

Bodin wrote two notable works toward the end of his life; his Colloquium of the Seven about Secrets of the Sublime (Colloquium heptaplomeres de rerum sublimium arcanis abditis) is an engaging dialogue in favor of religious tolerance. Bodin’s main contribution in the field of natural philosophy, the Theater of Nature (Universae naturae theatrum) was first published in 1596, the same year that Bodin died of the plague. He was given a Catholic burial in the Franciscan church of Laon.

2. Method for the Easy Comprehension of History

Bodin’s Methodus ad facilem historiarum cognitionem (Method for the Easy Comprehension of History) was first published in 1566, and revised in 1572. It is Bodin’s first important work and contains many of the ideas that are developed further in his other key systematic works. Some of them are human history, natural history, and divine history, later elaborated in the République, the Theatrum, and the Colloquium heptaplomeres respectively. Bodin’s purpose in writing the Methodus was to expose the art and method to be used in the study of history. His desire to elaborate a system and to synthesize all existing knowledge is easily detectable in the Methodus.

The first four chapters of the Methodus are largely a discussion concerning methodology. History and its different categories are defined in Chapter One. Chapters II and III discuss the order in which historical accounts are to be read, and the correct order for arranging all material. Chapter IV elucidates the choice of historians; it may be considered as an exposition of Bodin’s method for a critical study of history, that the student of history should move from generalized accounts to more detailed narratives. Reading should begin from the earliest times of recorded history and the reader should naturally progress towards more recent times. In order to obtain a thorough comprehension of the whole, certain other subjects – cosmography, geography, chorography, topography and geometry – are to be associated with the study of history. All material should be critically assessed; the background and training of historians must be taken into account, as well as their qualifications.

In order, then, that the truth of the matter may be gleaned from histories, not only in the choice of individual authors but also in reading them we must remember what Aristotle sagely said, that in reading history it is necessary not to believe too much or disbelieve flatly (…)If we agree to everything in every respect, often we shall take true things for false and blunder seriously in administering the state. But if we have no faith at all in history, we can win no assistance from it. (Bodin 1945, 42)

Of the ten chapters that constitute the Methodus, Chapter Six is by far the lengthiest, covering more than a third of the book, and it may be considered as a blueprint for the République. Chapters VII to IX seek to refute erroneous interpretations of history. Bodin’s first rebuttal concerns the myth, based on a biblical prophecy, of the four monarchies or empires as it was emphasized by many German Protestant theologians. Bodin’s second criticism concerns the idea of a golden age (and the superiority of the ancients in comparison with moderns). Furthermore, Bodin refutes the error of those who claim the independent origin of races. The final chapter of the Methodus contains a bibliography of universal history.

a. Methodology for the Study of History

There are three kinds of history, Bodin writes; divine, natural and human. The Methodus is an investigation into the third type, that is, the study of human actions and of the rules that govern them. Science is not concerned with particulars but with universals. Bodin therefore considers as absurd the attempts of jurisconsults to establish principles of universal jurisprudence from Roman decrees or, more generally, from Roman law, thus giving preference to one legal tradition. Roman law concerns the legislation of one particular state – and the laws of particular states are the subject of civil law—and as such change within a brief period of time. The correct study of law necessitates a different approach, one that was already described by Plato: the correct way to establish law and to govern a state is to bring together and compare the legal framework of all the states that have existed, and compile the very best of them. Together with other so-called legal humanists, like Budé, Alciat, and Connan, Bodin held that the proper understanding of universal law could only be obtained by combining the studies of history and law.

Indeed, in history the best part of universal law lies hidden; and what is of great weight and importance for the best appraisal of legislation – the custom of the peoples, and the beginnings, growth, conditions, changes, and decline of all states – are obtained from it. The chief subject matter of this Method consists of these facts, since no rewards of history are more ample than those usually gathered around the governmental form of states. (Bodin 1945, 8)

Bodin writes that there are four kinds of interpreters of law. The most skilled among them are those who are

 ...trained not only by precepts and forensic practice but also in the finest arts and the most stable philosophy, who grasp the nature of justice, not changeable according to the wishes of men, but laid down by eternal law; who determine skillfully the standards of equity; who trace the origins of jurisprudence from ultimate principles; who pass on carefully the knowledge of all antiquity; who, of course, know the power and the dominion of the emperor, the senate, the people, and the magistrates of the Romans; who bring to the interpretation of legislation the discussion of philosophers about laws and state; who know well the Greek and Latin languages, in which the statutes are set forth; who at length circumscribe the entire division of learning within its limits, classify into types, divide into parts, point out with words, and illustrate with examples. (Bodin 1945, 4-6)

b. Theory of Climates

The Theory of Climates is among Bodin’s best-known ideas. Bodin was not the first to discuss the topic; he owes much to classical authors like Livy, Hippocrates, Aristotle and Tacitus, who are referenced by Bodin himself. He also borrows from his contemporaries—especially historians, travelers, and diplomats – like Commines, Machiavelli, Copernicus, and Jean Cardan. Bodin’s observations on climate differed from that of his medieval predecessors, since Bodin was first and foremost interested in the practical implications of a theory: a correct understanding of the laws of the environment must be thought of as the starting point for all policy, laws and institutions (Tooley 1953, 83). Bodin believed that climate and other geographical factors influence, although they do not necessarily determine, the temperament of any given people. Accordingly, the form of state and legislation needs to be adapted to the temperament of the people, and the territory that it occupies.

Three different accounts of the Theory of Climates are found in Bodin’s writings. The earliest version is in Chapter Five of the Methodus. Although this passage contains the general principles of the theory, Bodin does not relate them to contemporary politics. It is in the first chapter of the fifth book of the République that the theory of climates is further amplified, and its relationship to contemporary politics established. Moreover, the Latin translation of the République contains a few notable additions to the theory.

According to Bodin, no one who has written about states has ever considered the question of how to adapt the form of a state to the territory where it is situated (near the sea or the mountains, etc.), or to the natural aptitudes of its people. Bodin holds that, amid the uncertainty and chaos of human history, natural influences provide us with a sure criterion for historical generalization. These stable and unchanging natural influences have a dominant role in molding the personality, physique, and historical character of peoples (Brown 1969, 87-88). This naturalistic approach is, to some extent, obscured by Bodin’s belief in astrology and numerology. Racial peculiarities, the influence of the planets and Pythagorean numbers were all part of Renaissance Platonism. Bodin combined these ideas with geographic determinism that closely followed the theories of Hippocrates and Strabo. (Bodin 1945, xiii)

Ptolemy divided the world into arctic, temperate, and tropic zones. In adopting the Ptolemaic zones Bodin divided earth into areas of thirty degrees from the equator northward. Different peoples have their capabilities and weaknesses. Southern people are contemplative and religious by nature; they are wise but lack in energy. Northern people, on the other hand, are active and large in stature, but lack in sagaciousness. The people of the South are intellectually gifted and thus resemble old men while the Northern people, because of their physical qualities, remind us of youth. Those that live in between these two regions—the men of the temperate zone—lack the excesses of the previous two, while being endowed with their better qualities. They may therefore be described as men in middle life—prudent and therefore gifted to become executives and statesmen. They are the Aristotelian mean between two extremes. The superiority of this third group is stressed by Bodin throughout his writings.

3. The Six Bookes of a Commonweale

Bodin’s most prominent contribution in the field of political philosophy was first published in 1576, and in his own Latin translation a decade later. Significant differences exist between the French and Latin versions of the text. Translations into other languages soon followed: Italian (1588), Spanish (1590), German (1592), and English (1606). The République must be considered, at least partially, as Bodin’s response to the most important political crisis in France during the sixteenth century: the French wars of religion (1562-1598). It was written as a defense of the French monarchy against the so-called Monarchomach writers, among them François Hotman (1524-1590), Theodore Beza (1519-1605) and the author of the Vindiciae contra tyrannos. The Monarchomach writers called for tyrannicide and considered it the role of the magistrates and the Estates General to limit the sovereign power of the ruler, and that this power be initially derived from the people.

Bodin published three different prefaces to the République. The first is an introduction found in all French editions. The second is a prefatory letter in Latin that appears in the French editions from 1578 onwards. The third preface is an introduction to the Latin editions. These three prefaces were an opportunity for Bodin to defend his work against writers who had attacked it. They give us an account of how Bodin’s opinions developed during the years that followed the publication of the République. In 1580, Bodin answered his detractors in a work entitled Apologie de René Herpin pour la République de Jean Bodin. René Herpin was a pseudonym used by Bodin.

The first book of the République discusses the principal ends and aims of the state, its different elements, and the nature and defining marks of sovereign power. In the second book, Bodin discusses different types of states (democracy, aristocracy, and monarchy) and concludes that there cannot exist a mixed state. In Chapter Five, Bodin examines the conditions under which a tyrant, that is, an illegitimate ruler who does not possess sovereign power, may be rightfully killed. A legitimate monarch, on the other hand, may not be resisted by his subjects – even if he should act in a tyrannical manner.

Book Three discusses the different parts of the state: the senate and its role, the role of magistrates and their relationship to sovereign power, and the different degrees of authority among magistrates. Colleges, corporations and universities are also defined and considered. The origin, flourishing and decline of states, and the reasons that influence these changes are the subject of Book Four. Book Five begins with an exposition of the Theory of Climate: laws of the state and the form of government are to be adapted to the nature of each people. Bodin then discusses the climatic variations between the North and South, and how these variations affect the human temperament. The final book of the République opens with the question of cencus and censorship that is, the assessment of each individual’s belongings, and the advantages that can be derived from it. Chapters Two and Three discuss the state’s finances, and the problem of debasement of the coinage. Chapter Four is a comparison of the three forms of state; Bodin argues that royal, or hereditary, (as opposed to elective) monarchy is the best form of state. The Salic law, or law of succession to the throne, is discussed: Bodin holds that the rule of women is against divine, natural, and human law. The Salic law, together with a law forbidding alienation of the public domain, called Agrarian law in the Methodus (Bodin 1945, p. 253), is one of the two fundamental laws, or leges imperii (Fr. loix royales), which impose legal limitations upon the authority of the sovereign prince. Fundamental laws concern the state of the kingdom and are annexed to the crown, and  the sovereign prince therefore cannot detract from them.

The concluding chapter of the République is a discussion concerning the principle of justice in the government of the state. Geometric, arithmetic, and harmonic justice are explained, as well as their relation to the different forms of state. A strong Platonic influence may be detected in the final chapter of the work: a wise ruler establishes harmony within the commonwealth, just as God has established harmony in the universe he has created. Every individual has their proper place and purpose in the commonwealth.

a. Concept of Sovereignty

The République opens with the following definition of a commonwealth: “A Commonweale is a lawfull government of many families, and of that which unto them in common belongeth, with a puissant soveraigntie.” (Bodin 1962, 1) (Fr. “République est un droit gouvernement de plusieurs ménages, et de ce qui leur est commun, avec puissance souveraine.” (Bodin 1583, 1) Lat.“Respublica est familiarum rerumque inter ipsas communium summa potestate ac ratione moderata multitude.” (Bodin 1586, 1)) The meaning of sovereign power is further clarified in Chapter Eight of the first book:

Maiestie or Soveraigntie is the most high, absolute, and perpetuall power over the citisens and subiects in a Commonweale: which the Latins cal Maiestatem, the Greeks akra exousia, kurion arche, and kurion politeuma; the Italians Segnoria, and the Hebrewes tomech shévet, that is to say, The greatest power to command. (Bodin 1962, 84)

Having defined sovereignty, Bodin then defines the meaning of the terms “perpetual” and “absolute”. A person to whom sovereignty is given for a certain period of time, upon the expiration of which they once again become private citizens, cannot be called sovereign. When sovereign power is given to someone for a certain period of time, the person or persons receiving it are but the trustees and custodians of that power, and the sovereign power can be removed from them by the person or persons that are truly sovereign. Sovereignty, therefore, Bodin writes, “is not limited either in power, charge, or time certaine.” Absolute power is the power of overriding ordinary law, and it has no other condition than that which is commanded by the law of God and of nature:

But it behoveth him that is a soveraigne not to be in any sort subiect to the commaund of another … whose office it is to give laws unto his subiects, to abrogat laws unprofitable, and in their stead to establish other: which hee cannot do that is himselfe subiect unto laws, or to others which have commaund over him. And that is it for which the law saith, That the prince is acquitted from the power of the laws[.] (Bodin 1962, 91)

From this and similar passages Bodin derives the first prerogative of a sovereign prince of which he gives the following definition: “Let this be the first and chiefe marke of a soveraigne prince, to bee of power to give laws to all his subiects in generall and to everie one of them in particular ... without consent of any other greater, equall, or lesser than himselfe” (Bodin 1962, 159). All other rights and prerogatives of sovereignty are included in the power of making and repealing laws, Bodin writes, and continues, “so that (to speak properly) a man may say, that there is but this only mark of soveraigne power considering that all other the rights thereof are contained in this”. The other prerogatives include declaring war and making peace, hearing appeals in the last instance, instituting and removing the highest officers, imposing taxes on subjects or exempting them, granting pardons and dispensations, determining the name, value, and measure of the coinage, and finally, requiring subjects to swear their loyalty to their sovereign prince.

Sovereignty and its defining marks or attributes are indivisible, and supreme power within the commonwealth must necessarily be concentrated on a single person or group of persons. Bodin argues that the first prerogative of a sovereign ruler is to give law to subjects without the consent of any other individual. It is from this definition that he derives the logical impossibility of dividing sovereignty, as well as the impossibility of the existence of a mixed state: if sovereignty, in other words, the power to give law, within the state were divided, for example,  between the prince, the nobility, and the people, there would exist in the commonwealth not one, but several agents that possess the power to give law. In such a case, Bodin argues, no one can be called a subject, since all have power to make law. Additionally, no one would be able to give laws to others, since law-givers would be forced to receive law from those upon whom they wish to impose laws. The state would, therefore, be popular or democratic. In the revised Latin edition of the République the outcome of divided sovereignty is described as a state of anarchy since no one would be willing to obey laws.

b. Definition of Law

Bodin writes that there is a great difference between law (Lat. lex; Fr. loi) and right (Lat. jus; Fr. droit). Law is the command of a sovereign prince, that makes use of his power, while right implies that which is equitable. A right connotes something with a normative content; law, on the other hand, has no moral content or normative implications. Bodin writes:

We must presuppose that this word Law, without any other addition, signifieth The right command of him or them, which have soveraigne power above others, without exception of person: be it that such commaundement concerne the subiects in generall, or in particular: except him or them which have given the law. Howbeit to speake more properly, A law is the command of a Soveraigne concerning all his subiects in generall: or els concerning generall things, as saith Festus Pompeius, as a privilege concerneth some one, or some few[.] (Bodin 1962, 156)

c. Limitations upon the Authority of the Sovereign Prince

Although the sovereign prince is not bound by civil law—neither by the laws of his predecessors, which have force only as long as their maker is alive, unless ratified by the new ruler, nor by his own laws—he is not free to do as he pleases, for all earthly princes have the obligation to follow the law of God and of nature. Absolute power is power to override ordinary law, but all earthly princes are subject to divine and natural laws, Bodin writes. To contravene the laws of God, “under the greatnesse of whome all monarches of the world ought to beare the yoke, and to bow their heads in all feare and reverence”, and nature mean treason and rebellion.

Contracts with Subjects and with Foreigners

Bodin mentions a few other things - besides the laws of God and of nature - that limit the sovereign prince’s authority. These include the prince’s contracts with his subjects and foreign princes, property rights of the citizens, and constitutional laws (leges imperii) of the realm. Regarding the difference between contracts and laws, Bodin writes that the sovereign prince is subject to the just and reasonable contracts that he has made, and in the observation of which his subjects have an interest, whilst laws obligate all subjects but not the prince. A contract between a sovereign prince and his subjects is mutually binding and it obligates both parties reciprocally. The prince, therefore, has no advantage over the subject on this matter. The prince must honor is contracts for three reasons: 1) Natural equity, which requires that agreements and promises be kept; 2) The prince’s honor and his good faith, since there is “no more detestable crime in a prince, than to bee false of his oath and promise”; and 3) The prince is the guarantor of the conventions and obligations that his subjects have with each other – it is therefore all the more important that the sovereign prince should render justice for his own act.

Fundamental Laws

Two fundamental laws (leges imperii) are discussed in the République. The first one is the Salic law, or the law of succession to the throne. The Salic law guarantees the continuity of the crown, and determines the legitimate successor (see Franklin 1973, Chapter 5). The other fundamental law is the law against alienation of the royal domain, which Bodin calls “Agrarian law” in the Methodus. As Franklin has observed, “The domain was supposed to have been set aside in order to provide a king with a source of annual income normally sufficient to defray the costs of government” (1973, 73). If the domain is alienated, this signifies lesser income to the crown, and possibly increased taxation upon the citizens. Fundamental laws are annexed and united to the crown, and therefore the sovereign ruler cannot infringe them. But should the prince decide to do so, his successor can always annul that which has been done in prejudice of the fundamental laws of the realm.

Inviolability of Private Property

Finally, Bodin derives from both natural law and the Old Testament that the sovereign prince may not take the private property of his subjects without their consent since this would mean violating the law of God and of nature. He writes: “Now then if a soveraigne prince may not remove the bounds which almightie God (of whom he is the living & breathing image) hath prefined unto the everlasting lawes of nature: neither may he take from another man that which is his, without iust cause” (Bodin 1962, 109; 110). The only exception to the rule, the just causes that Bodin refers to in this passage, concern situations where the very existence of the commonwealth is threatened. In such cases, public interest must be preferred over the private, and citizens must give up their private property in order to guarantee the safety and continuing existence of the commonwealth.

The preceding passage is one among many where the sovereign prince is described by Bodin as the “earthly image of God,” “God’s lieutenant for commanding other men,” or the person “to whom God has given power over us”. It is from this principle regarding the inviolability of private property that Bodin derives that new taxes may not be imposed upon citizens without their consent.

d. Difference between Form of State and Form of Government

Bodin holds that sovereignty cannot be divided – it must necessarily reside in one person or group of persons. Having shown that sovereignty is indivisible, Bodin moves on to refute the widely accepted political myth of the Renaissance that the Polybian model of a mixed state was the optimal form of state. Contrary to the opinions of Polybius, Aristotle, and Cicero, Bodin writes that there are only three types of state or commonwealth: monarchy, where sovereignty is vested with one person, aristocracy, where sovereignty is vested with a minority, and democracy, where sovereignty is vested in all of the people or a majority among them. Bodin’s denial of the possibility of dividing sovereignty directly results in the impossibility of a mixed state in the form that most Renaissance political theorists conceived it. It is with the help of historical and modern examples, most notably of Rome and Venice, that Bodin shows that the states that were generally believed to possess a mixed regime were not really so.

Even though Bodin refuses the idea that there be more than three types of commonwealth, he is willing to accept that there is a variety of governments - that is, different ways to govern the state. The way that the state is governed in no way alters its form nor its structure. Discussion concerning the difference between the form of state and government is found in Book Two. Bodin remarks that despite the importance of the question, no one before him has ever addressed it. All monarchies, aristocracies and popular states are either tyrannical, despotic, or legitimate (i.e. royal). These are not different species of commonwealth, Bodin observes, but diverse ways of governing the state. Tyrannical monarchy is one in which the sovereign ruler violates the laws of God, oppresses his subjects and treats their private property as his own. Tyrannical monarchy must not be confused with despotic monarchy, Bodin writes. Despotic, or lordly, monarchy “is that where the prince is become lord of the goods and persons of his subiects, by law of arms and lawfull warre; governing them as the master of a familie doth his slaves.” Bodin holds that there is nothing unfitting in a prince who has defeated his enemies in a just war, and who governs them under the laws of war and the law of nations. Finally, royal or legitimate monarchy is one in which the subjects obey the laws of the sovereign prince, and the prince in his turn obeys the laws of God and of nature; natural liberty and the right to private property are secured to all citizens.

Although most of Bodin’s examples concern monarchy, he writes that “The same difference is also found in the Aristocratique and popular estate: for both the one and the other may be lawful, lordly, and tirannicall, in such sort as I have said” (Bodin 1962, 200). Bodin qualifies as “absurd” and “treasonable” opinions according to which the constitution of France is a mixture of the three types of state—the Parlement representing aristocracy, the Estates General democracy, and the King representing monarchy.

e. The Question of Slavery

The question of slavery is addressed in Book One, Chapter Five of the République. Bodin is recognized today as one of the earliest advocates of the abolition of slavery. For him, slavery was a universal phenomenon in the sense that slaves exist in all parts of the world, and slavery was widely accepted by the droit des gens. Bodin writes that there are difficulties concerning slavery that have never been resolved. He wishes to answer the following question: “Is slavery natural and useful, or contrary to nature?”

Bodin opposes Aristotle’s opinion (Politics 1254a) according to which slavery is something natural – some people are born to govern and command, while it is the role of others to serve and obey. Bodin admits that “there is certain plausibility in the argument that slavery is natural and useful in the commonwealth.” After all, Bodin continues, the institution of slavery has existed in all commonwealths, and in all ages wise and good men have owned slaves. But if we are to consider the question according to commonly received opinions, thus allowing ourselves to be less concerned with philosophical arguments, we will soon understand that slavery is unnatural and contrary to human dignity.

Bodin’s opposition to slavery is manifold. First of all, he considers slavery in most cases to be unnatural, as the following passage attests: “I confesse that servitude is well agreeing unto nature, when a strong man, rich and ignorant, yeeldeth his obedience and service unto a wise, discreet and feeble poore man: but for wise men to serve fools, men of understanding to serve the ignorant, and the good to serve the bad; what can bee more contrarie unto nature?” (Bodin 1962, 34) Secondly, slavery is an affront to religion since the law of God forbids making any man a slave against their good will and consent. Thirdly, slavery is against human dignity, because of the countless indescribable humiliations that slaves have been forced to suffer. According to one interpretation, Bodin’s opposition to slavery must above all be understood within the context of his opinions concerning the commonwealth in that slavery poses a permanent threat to the stability of the state. Bodin relies on a historical narrative to prove that slavery is incompatible with a stable commonwealth (Herrel 1994, 56). Thus, in the following passage, he states:

Wherefore seeing it is proved by the examples of so many worlds of years, so many inconveniences of rebellions, servile warres, conspiracies eversions and changes to have happened unto Commonweals by slaves; so many murthers, cruelties, and detestable villanies to have bene committed upon the persons of slaves by their lords and masters: who can doubt to affirme it to be a thing most pernitious and daungerous to have brought them into a Commonweale; or having cast them off, to receive them againe? (Bodin 1962, 44)

4. Bodin’s Economic Thought

Bodin’s main economic ideas are expressed in two works: initially, in his Response to the Paradoxes of Malestroit, first published in 1568, then in a revised second version, in 1578. The Response is an analysis of the reasons for the significant and continuous price rises that afflicted sixteenth century Europe. It is in this work that Bodin is said to have given one of the earliest formulations of the Quantity Theory of Money. In its most elementary form, the Quantity Theory of Money is the affirmation that money supply directly affects price levels. Chapter Two of the sixth book of the République is a lengthy discussion of the possible resources of the state. There is a partial overlap between the two works since Bodin included certain passages of the Response in his République, and then incorporated them again in a revised form into the second edition of the Response.

a. Quantitative Theory of Money

High inflation was rampant in sixteenth century Europe. It began in Spain, and soon spread to its neighboring states. This was mainly due to the increase in the quantity of precious metals, namely silver and gold, that were brought by boat to Europe from the Spanish colonies in the New World. In 1563, the Chambre des Comptes de Paris decided to investigate the reasons for inflation, and the results of the investigation were published in 1566 in a study entitled The Paradoxes of the Seigneur de Malestroit on the Matter of Money. The author of the study was a man called Jean Cherruies “Seigneur de Malestroit”, of whom we know only fairly little. It was these “paradoxes” that Jean Bodin sought to refute in his work.

Malestroit held that the price rises are simply changes in the unit of account that have been occasioned by debasement, and that prices of precious metals have remained constant for three hundred years.

Bodin refuted Malestroit’s analysis on two counts. First, he was able to show that Malestroit’s use of data was incorrect: Malestroit’s central claim to back up his thesis was the unchanging price of velvet since the fourteenth century. Bodin, however, cast doubt on the fact whether velvet was even known in France at such an early period. Secondly, Bodin was able to demonstrate that debasement alone did not explain the reasons for such major and significant price rises; while debasement was one of the factors that had occasioned such inflation, it was far from being the principal cause.

Bodin lists five major factors as contributory causes for such widespread inflation:  (1) The sudden abundance of precious metals, namely silver and gold, throughout Europe; (2) Monopolies; (3) Scarcity, caused by excessive export trade, quasi non-existing import trade, and waste; (4) Fashionable demand by rich people for certain luxury products; and, finally, (5) Debasement.

Of these five causes, Bodin considered the abundance of precious metals to be the most important.

b. The State’s Finances and the Question of Taxation and Property Rights

In Chapter Two of the final book of the République Bodin discusses the question of the commonwealth securing its finances. Seven possible sources of income are listed. These are: (1) Public domain; (2) Profits of conquests; (3) Gifts from friends; (4) Tributes from allies; (5) Profits of trading ventures; (6) Customs on exports and imports; and, finally, (7) Taxes on the subject. Bodin considers the public domain to be the most honest and the most reliable source of income for the commonwealth. He writes that throughout history sovereign princes and their citizens have taken it as a universal rule that the public domain should be holy, inviolable and inalienable. The inalienability of the public domain is of the utmost importance, Bodin writes, in order that “princes should not bee forced to overcharge their subiects with imposts, or to seeke any unlawfull meanes to forfeit their goods”. The seventh method of raising revenue on Bodin’s list is by levying taxes on the subject, but it may be used only when all other measures have failed and the preservation of the commonwealth demands it.

Bodin considers the inalienability of the public domain, together with the Salic law, to be one of the fundamental laws (Lat. leges imperii; Fr. loix royales) of the state. Like many of his contemporaries, Bodin held that the levying of new taxes without consent was a violation of the property rights of the individual, and, as such, contrary to the law of God and nature. He was particularly firm in opposing new taxation without proper consent and sought confirmation for his opinion in French and European history. One of the main differences between a legitimate ruler and an illegitimate one concerns the question of how each treats the private property of their subjects. Property rights are protected by the law of God and of nature, and therefore, violation of the private property of citizens is a violation of the law of God and of nature. A tyrant makes his subjects into his slaves, and treats their private property as if it were his own.

5. Writings Concerning Religion

The 16th and 17th centuries witnessed fierce internal conflict and power struggles at the heart of Christianity. The country most seriously ravaged by the combat between the Catholics and the Huguenots was France. Furthermore, a world of hugely diverse religious beliefs had been recently unveiled beyond the walls of Christendom, and the question of knowing which religion was the true religion (vera religio), or that which God wanted humanity to follow, needed to be addressed. Bodin’s main contributions concerning religion are Démonomanie, Colloquium heptaplomeres and the Universae naturae theatrum. Additionally, the République contains passages that discuss religion and the stability of the state.

a. Colloquium heptaplomeres and the Question of Religious Tolerance

Bodin’s Colloquium of the Seven about Secrets of the Sublime (Colloquium heptaplomeres de rerum sublimium arcanis abditis) is often described as one of the earliest works of comparative religion. It is believed to have been written sometime during the 1580s, although it was circulated in manuscript for nearly three centuries before it was published in its entirety in 1857. The Colloquium is a discussion between seven men of different religions or convictions that have gathered in the home of Coronaeus, a Catholic living in Venice, Italy. The participants are Salomon, a Jew, Octavius, a convert from Catholicism to Islam, Toralba, a natural philosopher, Senamus a skeptic, Fridericus, a Lutheran, and Curtius a Calvinist. The men engage in listening to music, reading, gastronomical delights, and discussions concerning religion.

The Colloquium begins with a story that is told by Octavius. A ship leaves the port of Alexandria as gentle winds blow, but an intensive tempest soon arises. The ship’s captain, terrified by the situation, is forced to drop the anchors, and urges everyone to pray to God. The crewmen, being from many different places and of various confessions, all pray for the one God that they have faith in. The storm calms down eventually and the ship is brought safely to port. When Octavius had finished his story, Coronaeus asked the following question: “Finally, with such a variety of religions represented [on the ship], whose prayers did God heed in bringing the ship safely to port?”

The matter of true religion is discussed in the final three books of the Colloquium heptaplomeres. True religion, Bodin holds, is tolerant of all religions, and accepts different ways to approach God. Leathers Kuntz has observed that “no religion is true whose point of view is not universal, whose expression is not free, whose center does not reflect the intimate harmony of God and nature” (Bodin 2008, xliii). The same opinion is expressed in the Démonomanie and in Bodin’s letter to one Jean Bautru des Matras, an advocate working in Paris. In the latter, Bodin writes that “different opinions concerning religion must not lead you astray, as long as you understand that true religion is nothing else than the turning of a purged soul toward true God”.

b. The Question of True Religion and Bodin’s Personal Faith

Leathers Kuntz has detected three stages in the development of Bodin’s religious thinking. She has argued that Bodin’s religious views became more liberal as he grew older (Bodin 2008, xliii-xliv). In 1559, when he wrote the Discours au Senate et au peuple de Toulouse, Bodin held that people should be brought up publicly in one religion. This he considered as an indispensable element in the cohesiveness of the state. Religious unity should be preserved, and religion should not be debated, since disputations damage religion and cast doubt upon it. When writing the République, Bodin’s main concern was the political stability of the French state. He considered religion to provide for the unity of the state, and as supporting the king’s power. Furthermore, religion strengthened the subjects’ obedience toward their sovereign prince and their respect for the execution of laws. Uniformity of worship must be enforced within the commonwealth when it is possible, but tolerance should become the norm when religious minorities become influential enough to no longer be repressed. The final and most liberal stage of Bodin’s religious opinions becomes most apparent in the Colloquium heptaplomeres, “in which his religious opinions seem to have developed into a kind of theism which leaves each man’s religion, provided he has some, to his own personal conscience” (ibid.).

It is impossible to say anything definitive concerning Bodin’s religious views. We may observe that Bodin’s faith seems less loyal to a particular established church than to a deep sense of honoring God. Bodin’s public religious opinions fluctuated throughout his life. As a consequence, he was accused of many things, including of being a Jew, a Calvinist, a heretical Catholic, and an atheist during his lifetime and after his death. Some scholars have even suggested that there are traces of Nicodemism, or religious dissimulation, in both his works and actions.

Scholars have debated for many years the question of knowing which of the opinions expressed in the Colloquium heptaplomeres should be regarded as Bodin’s personal beliefs. Considering that so many, often contradictory, opinions have been advanced, it may be wise to remark that perhaps “all the speakers represent Bodin’s thinking at one time or another. No one represents his thinking exclusively, but Bodin is sympathetic to some views of each as the dialogue develops. The point seems to be, however, that regardless of Bodin’s approval or disapproval of the religious views represented in the dialogue, he constantly stresses the need for toleration of all religions” (Bodin 2008, xliv). It has also been suggested that Bodin’s opinions and views regarding religious faith are so full of compromise that they ultimately amount to a sort of natural religion. Finally, it has been suggested that Bodin’s writings on the topic of religion “transcended the narrow bounds of confessional religion” (Bodin 1980, 1).

Although Bodin’s understanding of true religion as something profoundly personal, for which no church was required, made him an unorthodox believer in the eyes of many, it seems inconceivable that he should be considered an atheist (Bodin 2008, xxix). In fact, he considered atheism to be extremely dangerous to the commonwealth, as the following passage from the République (4, VII), discussing the difference between atheism and superstition, proves:

 And truely they (in mine opinion) offend much, which thinke that the same punishment is to be appointed for them that make many gods, and them that would have none at all: or that the infinitie of gods admitted, the almightie and everliving God is thereby taken away. For that superstition how great soever it be, doth yet hold men in feare and awe, both of the laws and of the magistrats; as also in mutuall duties and offices one of them towards another: whereas mere Atheisme doth utterly root out of mens minds all the feare of doing evill. (Bodin 1962, 539)

Bodin’s reasons for combating atheism in this passage concern the stability of the state: atheists must not be tolerated in the commonwealth since they hold neither moral nor ethical issues regarding breaking the laws of the state. But Bodin had another reason to detest atheism: atheists are blasphemous because they deny the existence of God.

6. On Witchcraft

Bodin’s De la démonomanie des sorciers (On the Demon-Mania of Witches) was first published in 1580 in French, and soon translated into Latin (1581), German (1581) and Italian (1587). Because of its wide distribution and numerous editions, historians have held it accountable for prosecutions of witches during the years that followed its publication. Many readers have been perplexed by the intolerant character of the Démonomanie. Bodin had a strong belief in the existence of angels and demons, and believed that they served as intermediaries between God and human beings; God intervenes directly in the world through the activity of angels and demons. Demonism, together with atheism and any attempt to manipulate demonic forces through witchcraft or natural magic, was treason against God and to be punished with extreme severity. The principal reason, therefore, to punish someone of witchcraft is “to appease the anger of God, especially if the crime is directly against the majesty of God, as this one is”.

Bodin was given the incentive to write the Démonomanie after he took part in the proceedings against a witch in April 1578. His objective in writing the Démonomanie was to “throw some light on the subject of witches, which seems marvelously strange to everyone and unbelievable to many.” Furthermore, the work was to serve as “a warning to all those who read it, in order to make it clearly known that there are no crimes which are nearly so vile as this one, or which deserve more serious penalties.” Finally, he wished to “respond to those who in printed books try to save witches by every means, so that it seems Satan has inspired them and drawn them to his line in order to publish these fine books” (Bodin 2001, 35-7). Among these “protectors of witches,” as Bodin qualified them, was a German Protestant by the name of Johann Weyer, who considered witches to be delusional and excessively melancholic, and recommended physical healing and religious instruction as a remedy to their condition, rather than corporal or capital punishment. Bodin feared that this might lead judges to consider witches as mentally ill, and, as a consequence, permit them to go without punishment.

The Démonomanie is divided into four books. Book One begins with a set of definitions. Bodin then discusses to what extent men may engage in the occult, and the differences between lawful and unlawful means to accomplish things. He also discusses the powers of witches and their practices: whether witches are able to transform men into beasts, induce or inspire in them illnesses, or perhaps even bring about their death. The final book is a discussion concerning ways to investigate and prosecute witches. Bodin’s severity and his rigorousness in condemning witches and witchcraft is largely based on the contents of the final book of the Démonomanie.

Bodin lists three necessary and indisputable proofs upon which a sentence can be based: (1) Truth of the acknowledged and concrete fact; (2) Testimony of several sound witnesses; and (3) Voluntary confession of the person who is charged and convicted of the crime. Certain other types of evidence, such as public reputation or forced confession, are not regarded by Bodin as indisputable proofs, but simply as “presumptions”, or circumstantial evidence, concerning the guilty nature of the person being charged. Presumptions may serve in the conviction and sentencing of witches in cases where clear proof is lacking.

There are fifteen “detestable crimes” that witches may be guilty of, and even the least of them, Bodin affirms, merits painful death. The death penalty, however, must only be sentenced by a competent judge and based on solid proof that eliminates all possibility of error. In cases where sufficient proof is wanting, where there are neither witnesses, nor confession, nor factual evidence, and where only mere presumptions, even strong ones, exist, Bodin is opposed to a death sentence: “I do not recommend that because of strong presumptions one pass sentence of death – but any other penalty except death...One must be very sure of the truth to impose the death sentence.” Bodin may have considered witchcraft an insult against God, and as such meriting the penalty of death, but he nevertheless believed in the rule of law, as in this other passage where he unequivocally states that “it is better to acquit the guilty than to condemn the innocent” (Bodin 2001, 209-210).

7. Natural Philosophy

The Universae naturae theatrum, which was published in the year of his death in 1596, may be considered as the most systematic exposition of Bodin’s vision of the world. It remains the least studied of his works and has never been translated into English. Bodin himself informs us that the Theatrum was written in 1590. The French translation of the work (Le Théâtre de la nature universelle) was published in 1597.

Ever since the beginning of his career Bodin sought to methodologically study all things, human and divine. He writes:

Of history, that is, the true narration of things, there are three kinds: human, natural, and divine. The first concerns man; the second, nature; the third, the Father of nature. /…/ So it shall come about that from thinking first about ourselves, then about our family, then about our society we are led to examine nature and finally to the true history of Immortal God, that is, to contemplation. (Bodin 1945, 15-16)

The Theatrum is the culmination point of Bodin’s systematic examination of things, and as such it is a deeply religious work. Bodin turns to the study of nature in order to better know God:

And indeed the Theater of Nature is nothing other than the contemplation of those things founded by the immortal God as if a certain tablet were placed under the eyes of every single one so that we may embrace and love the majesty of that very author, his goodness, wisdom, and remarkable care in the greatest matters, in moderate affairs, in matters of the least importance” (Bodin 2008, xxx)

Bodin believed that the French civil wars were occasioned, at least partly, by God’s dissatisfaction – God was punishing the French for their growing irreligious sentiment. The Theatrum has been described as an attack against those arrogant and ungodly philosophers, or naturalists, who wish to explain everything without reference to the creator and father of all things that is God. God is the author of all existing things, and the contemplation of nature brings us closer to Him. Furthermore, contemplating nature makes us love God for the care and goodness that he shows us.

The Theatrum has been written in a pseudo-dialogue form; it is a discussion between an informant, Mystagogus, and his questioner Theorus. The work opens with a short overview of the text, in which Bodin stresses the importance of order for the study of things. This gives him the opportunity to criticize Aristotle, who failed to discuss things in the right order; simpler things must be discussed before more complex ones, and therefore matters of physics should have been discussed after metaphysical things. Arranging all the material that is being considered in a convenient order – simplest notions to be studied first, and difficult ones later – is one of the distinctive characteristics of the Ramist framework of knowledge, as McRae has observed (McRae 1955, 8). McRae considers that, together with the Juris universi distributio, Bodin’s Theatrum “is perhaps the most thoroughly Ramist of any of his works.” Bodin’s two main objectives in the first book of the Theatrum are to prove that there is only one principle in nature, that is, God, and, that it is He who has created this world and He who governs it.

Other topics that Bodin discusses in Book One include matter, form and the causes of things. Furthermore, movement, generation, corruption and growth are considered, as well as things related to them: time and place, void, finitude and infinitude. In Book Two, Bodin examines elements, meteorites, rocks, metals and minerals. Book Three is a discussion on the subjects of the nature of plants and animals. The fourth book contains Bodin’s doctrine concerning soul; angels are also discussed in Book Four. The final book of the Theatrum discusses celestial bodies – their natural movement, the admirable harmony that exists between them, and the structure of the heavens. The final book attests of Bodin’s enmity toward Copernicus’ heliocentric system (Bodin 1596, 554 and especially 574-583); Bodin relies on the writings of Ptolemy, Aristotle, and the Holy Scripture in combating Copernicus. He dismisses Copernicus’ hypothesis concerning the heliocentric system on the grounds that it is “contrary to the evidence of the senses, to the authority of the Scriptures, and incompatible with Aristotelian physics.”

According to a recent interpretation by Blair, Bodin’s objective in writing the Theatrum was first and foremost to combat three impious propositions of ancient philosophy: (1) The eternity of the world; (2) The necessity of the laws of nature; and (3) The mortality of the soul.

Against the Eternity of the World

One solution to the conflict between Aristotelian philosophy of the eternity of the world and the Judeo-Christian account of creation—God has created the world, therefore it is not eternal, had been proposed by Thomas Aquinas. He argued that human reason alone cannot establish whether the world is eternal or not; the problem can be solved only by an appeal to faith and to biblical authority. Bodin’s argument differs from that of Aquinas. Bodin offers a rational demonstration based on “arguments for an all-powerful God, who knows no necessity and has complete free will”. Several scholars have observed that Bodin’s emphasis on divine free will is “characteristic of Christian nominalists like Duns Scotus and of Jewish philosophers like Maimonides” (Blair 1997, 118) The concluding syllogism for the “voluntary first cause” that is God is as follows: “Nothing can be eternal by nature whose first cause is voluntary; but the first cause of the world is voluntary; therefore the world cannot be eternal by nature, since its state and condition depend on the decision and free will of another.” (Blair 1997, 118)

Against Natural Necessity

The second conclusion is drawn from the unlimited freedom of God’s will: not only is it impossible that the world should be eternal, but furthermore it is arranged according to a divine plan. According to Bodin, providential divine governance is twofold: ordinary providence, where laws that govern nature under so-called normal circumstances are chosen by God, and extraordinary providence, where God is able to suspend those laws at will at any time he chooses, in order to intervene in the world (Blair 1997, 120). Bodin offers the following explanation for the existence of apparently useless or evil features of nature. He begins by claiming that everything in creation is good, and evil is simply the absence of good; this same idea is repeated in the Paradoxon. Then he attempts to illustrate, through various examples, that even things that are apparently evil in nature serve a “useful purpose in God’s good and wise plan” (Blair 1997, 122).

Immortality of the Soul

Bodin’s demonstration concerning the immortality of the soul is based on the soul’s intermediate nature: the soul is both corporeal and immortal. Blair defines this particular demonstration as “possibly Bodin’s most noteworthy innovation” and as a “significant departure from the standard or orthodox accounts [concerning the soul]” (Blair 1997, 137; 142). In combating the mortality of the soul, Blair writes, Bodin is reacting against all forms of impious philosophizing: against Averroes for denying the personal immortality of the soul; against Pomponazzi for claiming that philosophy shows the soul to be mortal; and against all those, like Pomponazzi or even Duns Scotus, who deny the rational demonstrability of this central doctrine. But Bodin calls his opponents only “Epicureans,” using the term to designate at first, generally, those who doubt the immortality of the soul, then more specifically those who, barely above the level of brutes, take pleasure and pain as the measure of good and evil and believe in the random distribution of atoms. (Blair 1997, 138)

Bodin’s first argument in favor of the immortality of the soul is based on empirical evidence concerning the ability of the soul to function independently of the body: during ecstatic experiences, as these have been conveyed by many learned men, it has been reported that the soul is able to hear, feel and understand while being temporarily transported outside the living body. Two further demonstrations follow. First, Bodin affirms that extremes are always joined by intermediates; passing from one extreme to another always necessitates passing through a 'middle' being and that there exists only two extremes in the world; (1) Form completely separated from matter, meaning angels and demons, and (2) Form entirely concrete, inseparable from matter, except by destruction, that is, natural bodies. Between these two extremes there must necessarily exist some intermediate which joins the two. This intermediate is form separable from matter, or, as Bodin states it, the soul. He concludes: “if therefore the human soul [mens] is separable from the dead body, it follows necessarily that it survives and carries out its actions without the operation of the senses” (Blair 1997, 139). Bodin’s final demonstration is as follows:

Given the extremes, of which one is totally corruptible (natural elements or bodies) and one is totally incorruptible (angels and demons), there must be an intermediate, which is corrupted in one part of itself, but free from corruption in the other; but this is nothing other than man, who participates in both natures: brute elements, plants, stones are far inferior to man in worth and dignity, and since man alone associates with angels and demons, he alone can link the celestial to the terrestrial, superior to inferior, immortal to mortal. (Blair 1997, 139)

Humans participate in both extremes and yet form an entity that is distinct from them. According to the standard view, the corporeal body is connected with the incorporeal soul, but Bodin’s demonstration is not built on this distinction because, for him, the soul is both immortal and corporeal. As Blair has observed, “for Bodin the human hypostasis mediates between form separated from matter (disembodied souls and angels) and form fully embedded in matter (as in all natural bodies), by virtue of its soul, which is corporeal, yet separable from the material body” (Blair 1997, 139-40). The following passage elucidates Bodin’s rather peculiar demonstration:

The body of the soul is not material, but spiritual – yet corporeal nonetheless: “from which it follows that human souls, angels and demons consist of the same corporeal nature, but not of bone, nor of flesh, but of an invisible essence. Like air, or fire, or both, or of a celestial essence, surpassing with its fineness the most subtle bodies: thus, even if we grant it is a spiritual body, it is a body nonetheless.” (Blair 1997, 140)

According to Blair, Bodin constructs a new type of natural philosophy that seeks to combine religion with philosophy, a combination of philosophical research concerning causes with a pious recognition of divine providence and the greatness of God.

Although Bodin often refers to Holy Scripture, he also constantly reminds us of the importance of reason and reasoning – so long as we do not infringe upon the limits of reason. Bodin uses physics to serve religious ends and the fundamental principle behind Bodin’s strategy is the Augustinian precept, later adopted by Aquinas in his synthesis of reason and faith, that truth is one and that there is, indeed, unity of knowledge: a necessary agreement between philosophy and religion exists, and therefore “natural philosophy as a reasoned investigation can never contradict true religion” (Blair 1997, 143).

8. Other Works

a. Juris universi distributio

The Juris universi distributio (Fr. Exposé du droit universel) was first published in 1578, but, as the Dedicatory Epistle of the Methodus informs us, it already existed in manuscript form twelve years earlier. Unlike later editions of the work that were published as books, the first edition of the Distributio was in the form of a poster, measuring approximately 40 by 180 cm, to be hung on the walls of universities.

Bodin’s objective in writing the Juris universi distributio was to arrive at a systematization of universal law. He sought to realize this by the study of history, paired with a comparative method which analyzes the different legal systems that either currently exist or have existed in the past. Bodin uses the same method in his main political works, (République and Methodus), in which comparative public law and its historical study permit Bodin to erect a theory of the state. Bodin is interested in “universal history”, of which his Methodus is an example, in the same way that he is interested in “universal law”, and it seems that the same type of historical and comparative method may be used in discovering them.

According to Bodin, law is divided into two categories: natural (ius naturale) and human (ius humanum). Bodin thus rejects the common threefold division based on the Digest – natural law, law of peoples and civil law –  because he considers dichotomy more convenient. The two principal divisions of human law are ius civile (civil law) and ius gentium (law of peoples). Bodin strongly criticizes law professors, or Romanists, for he writes that they have concentrated almost exclusively on ius civile – particularly the civil law of the Romans - and that, as a consequence, the ius gentium has not been properly studied, and, therefore, has no proper methodology. Bodin’s personal interest lies precisely in the ius gentium because it is concerned with the universal laws that are common to all peoples. The methods of the Romanists are inadequate for the study of ius gentium because the ius civile varies from state to state and no universally valid truths can be derived from it; in this sense it is not even part of legal science. A new critical method is therefore required; a method that is both historical and comparative.

Bodin’s system of universal law is a drastic rupture with the exegetical methods of the Middle Ages. Medieval jurists applied Roman law to their own societies and saw no problem in doing so. It is with the arrival of the so-called humanist scholars, in the sixteenth century, and their use of the methods of classical philology, that the internal coherence and authority of the Corpus juris civilis were challenged.

b. Moral Philosophy

Bodin’s Paradoxon quod nec virtus ulla in mediocritate nec summum hominis bonum in virtutis actione consistere possit (Fr. Paradoxe de Jean Bodin qu’il n’y a pas de vertu en médiocrité ni au milieu de deux vices) was first published in Latin in 1596, although Bodin had completed the text in 1591. Two French translations were later published. Bodin’s own translation dates from 1596, but it remained unpublished until 1598. Bodin’s translation may be considered as a revised version of the Latin text, rather than its simple translation. The Latin edition includes a preface that does not exist in the French version.

The Paradoxon has been written in dialogue form, and is a discussion between a father and a son. During the course of the dialogue, the son repeatedly refers to the authority of Aristotle. His opinions are often refuted by the father, who refers to the writings of Plato and to the Holy Scripture. The term “paradox” in the title refers to the fact that Bodin acknowledges his views to be in contradiction with the moral opinions that were generally accepted in his day – especially concerning the Aristotelian doctrine of the mean.

The work opens with a discussion concerning the question of good and evil and that of divine justice. This is followed by an outline of the basic structure of Bodin’s moral philosophy: God is the sovereign good, or, “that which is the most useful and the most necessary to every imaginable creature”. He is also the source of all other things that are good. Evil is defined as the privation of good – a definition that Bodin traces to St. Augustine. The same definition is found in the Theatrum, where it is used to support the argument that everything in Creation is good – God has not created anything evil (Blair 1997, 122). The good of man and a contented life are discussed, followed by a discussion concerning particular virtues and vices, as well as their origins. Bodin refutes Aristotle’s doctrine of the mean. Discussion concerning moral and intellectual virtues follows. Bodin then examines prudence; he then claims that prudence alone helps us choose between good and evil. The final section discusses wisdom and the love of God. The father affirms that wisdom is found in the fear of offending God. Fear of God is inseparable from love of God – together they form the basis of wisdom.

c. Writings on Education

Bodin wrote or compiled four works where he discusses the education of children: The Address to the Senate and People of Toulouse on the Education of Youth in the Commonwealth, Epître à son neveu, Sapientia moralis epitome, and Consilium de institutione principis aut alius nobilioris ingenii. The earliest of them, the Oratio, is a discourse that was given in Toulouse in 1559, and published the same year. The three other works date from a later period; the Epître is a letter written to Bodin’s nephew, dated November 1586, and the Epitome was first published in 1588. Evidence within the Consilia suggests that it was written sometime between 1574 and 1586, although it remained unpublished until 1602.

Address to the Senate and People of Toulouse on the Education of Youth in the Commonwealth

Bodin’s Oratio de instituenda in repub. juventute ad senatum populumque tolosatem (Fr. Le discours au sénat et au peuple de Toulouse sur l’éducation à donner aux jeunes gens dans la république) is the most valuable single document that informs us of Bodin’s stay in Toulouse in the 1550's. Furthermore, it is Bodin’s earliest surviving work on education and contains a detailed portrayal of the humanist ideal that Bodin embraced during this period.

Nothing is more salutary to a city than to have those who shall one day rule the nation be educated according to virtue and science. It is only by providing youth with proper education and intellectual and moral culture that the glory of France, and that of its cities could be preserved. Art and science are the auxiliaries of virtue, and one cannot conceive of living – much less leading a happy life – without them. Bodin urges the people of Toulouse to participate in the movement of the Renaissance. The town is well-known for its faculty of law, and he argues that the study of humanities and belles-lettres should also be appended to the study of law.

In Bodin's time, the children of Toulouse were either given a public education – in which case they were most often sent to Paris – or taught privately, in domicile. While both systems have their inconveniences, Bodin considers that public schooling must be favored. In order to prevent children from being sent to Paris to be educated, however, a collège must be built in Toulouse and the children of Toulouse should be educated in their own hometown. Bodin proposes that all children – including gifted children belonging to the poorest classes – be sent to public schools where they shall be taught according to the official method.

Epître de Jean Bodin touchant l’institution de ses enfants à son neveu

This short work is Bodin’s response in the form of a letter dated November 9, 1586, to his nephew’s enquiry concerning the education of children. Bodin’s nephew had welcomed a newborn son to his family, and had turned to Bodin for advice on how to give him a proper education. Bodin’s advice came in the form of a description of how he taught his own children when they were three and four years old.

Bodin began by teaching his children the Latin names of things. Having observed that they have a good memory and necessary mental capacities, Bodin asked them to repeat more abstract words, and began informing them about such things as how old the world is (5,534 years), how many planets there are, and the names of these planets. He taught them the names of body parts, what senses we have, the virtues and vices, and so forth. Knowledge of different things was acquired by a continuous daily exercise. Soon after, Bodin had his children interrogate each other, thus allowing himself to retire from this task. The study of Latin grammar soon followed, as well as the study of moral sentences in both French and Latin. The children would then begin the study of arithmetic and geometry. This was followed by the translation of Cicero’s writings from Latin to French.

Sapientia moralis epitome 

The Sapientia moralis epitome was published in Paris in 1588. It consists of 210 moral maxims that have been arranged into groups of seven sentences. Each group is a discussion upon a common topic: youth and education, nature, truth and opinion, virtue, war, liberty, marriage, etc. The majority of the maxims are Bodin’s own formulations of ideas expressed by Ovid, Horace, Juvenale and Lucretius.

Consilium de institutione principis

Bodin’s Consilium de institutione principis was first published in 1602 as part of a compilation entitled Consilia Iohannis Bodini Galli et Fausti Longiani Itali de principe recte instituendo. Although the determination of a precise date seems impossible, evidence within the work suggests that Bodin composed it sometime between 1574 and 1586.

The Consilium is a collection of precepts for the young princes of the Saxon court. The content of the Consilium is in many ways identical to the views that were expressed in the Epître, although the Consilium is more detailed. Young princes are to be taught in small groups, and their eating and sleeping habits are to be observed, so that they remain alert and in good health.

Bodin particularly recommends the study of two texts: Peter Ramus’ Dialectica, and Pibrac du Faur’s Quatrains. The education of the princes is to be completed by the study of law and the art of government. Knowledge of practical matters should be acquired by studying “the state of the republica and its offices and the laws, customs and natures of various peoples.” Knowledge in practical matters is necessary in order to acquire prudence. According to Bodin, only a prudent prince is worthy of his people (Rose 1980, 57-58).

d. Bodin’s Surviving Correspondence

Several letters from Bodin’s personal correspondence have survived to the present day; (for the complete list, see Couzinet 2001, 32-36). Chauviré published a series of letters as an Appendix to his Jean Bodin, auteur de la République. The most important among them are Bodin’s letter, written in Latin, to one Jean Bautru des Matras, as well as Bodin’s account from January 1583, addressed to his brother-in-law, regarding the events that took place in Antwerp when the Duke of Alençon was trying to help the Low Countries in their efforts to drive out the Spanish.

Later, Moreau-Reibel made a discovery in France’s Bibliothèque Nationale, recueil manuscrit 4897 of the library’s fonds français, and published a series of five letters that had been brought together by a certain Philippe Hardouyn. These letters were written between 1589-93. Together they complete our understanding of the possible reasons that made Bodin a ligueur. A sixth letter from this same period is Bodin’s notorious letter of 20 January 1590, in which he explains the reasons that made him a supporter of the Catholic League. A couple of letters from the correspondence between Bodin and Walsingham, dating from 1582, have also survived.

9. Influence

As the work’s numerous editions and translations attest, Bodin’s République was widely read in Europe after its publication, up until the mid-seventeenth century. It was subsequently forgotten, however, and Bodin’s influence during the eighteenth century was only marginal. It was not until the twentieth century that his works, slowly, but decisively, began to interest scholars again. Growing interest in his works has assured Bodin the place he deserves among the most important political thinkers of the sixteenth century. New translations and modern editions of his works have made his ideas accessible to wider audiences.

Among Bodin’s best-known ideas is the Theory of Climate that is currently most often associated with another French philosopher, Montesquieu (1689-1755). Bodin’s comparative and empirical approach in the fields of historical methodology, jurisprudence, and religion represented a break with medieval traditions. He was among the most influential legal philosophers of his time, and his Colloquium heptaplomeres is one of the earliest works of comparative religious studies. Bodin’s ideas concerning religious tolerance and the abolition of slavery found an echo among European writers of both the seventeenth and eighteenth centuries. Although the Colloquium heptaplomeres remained unpublished until the 1840s, scholars were familiar with its ideas due to manuscript copies that circulated in Europe. The numerous editions of his Démonomanie, on the other hand, testify to an interest previously demonstrated toward his ideas regarding witchcraft. Finally, Bodin’s Response to the Paradoxes of Malestroit includes one of the earliest formulations of the Quantity Theory of Money.

In political theory, Bodin’s most influential contribution remains his Theory of Sovereignty, and the conceptualization of sovereign power. A majority of scholars have labeled Bodin as an absolutist. For others, he favored a type of constitutionalism. Still others have observed that he shifted from the perceived constitutionalism of his early writings toward a more absolutist theory in the République. His writings were received in various ways in different parts of Europe, and interpretations regarding them were often contradictory – depending on the country. His Theory of Sovereignty was used by royalists and parliamentarians alike to defend their widely differing opinions. In France, for example, his political theory was largely absorbed into the absolutist movement and the doctrine of the divine right of kings that became highly influential soon after Bodin’s death; one needs only to think of Cardinal Richelieu and Louis XIV. For example, Jacques-Bénigne Bossuet (1627-1704), who was tutor to the oldest son of Louis XIV, argued in favor of an absolute hereditary monarchy from Scriptural sources in his Politics Drawn from the Very Words of Holy Scripture (Politique tirée des propres paroles de l'Écriture sainte). Other French writers who incorporated absolutist elements from Bodin’s theory in their own writings are Pierre Grégoire de Toulouse (c. 1540-1597), Charles Loyseau (1566-1627), and Cardin Le Bret (1558-1655).

The term “monarchomachs” (Fr., monarchomaques) denotes the writers – Protestants or Catholics – who opposed the powers of the monarch. The term was first coined by the Scottish jurist and royalist William Barclay (1546-1608) in his De Regno et Regali Potestate (1600). Similar to what Bodin had done in his République, Barclay defended the rights of kings. Giovanni Botero (1544-1617) was one of the earliest writers to have used the expression “reason of state” (Fr., Raison d’état) in his work Della ragion di Stato (1589). Bodin’s political writings may have been one of the sources used by Botero and his followers.

In Germany, Johannes Althusius (1557-1638) adopted Bodin’s theory of sovereignty in his Politica methodice digesta (1603), but argued that the community is always sovereign. In this sense, every commonwealth – no matter what its form may be – is popular. Dutch jurist Hugo Grotius published his renowned De jure belli ac pacis in 1625; Grotius does not conceal his admiration for Bodin, nor for the method used by French writers that consisted of combining the study of history with the study of law.

Bodin’s République was among the works that introduced the idea of legislative sovereignty in England. His considerable influence upon Elizabethan and Jacobean political thought in England, one scholar has observed, was largely due to his precise definition of sovereignty. Among the political writers who defended the powers of the king, Sir Robert Filmer (c. 1588-1653) drew heavily upon Bodin’s writings. One shorter text, in particular, The Necessity of the Absolute Power of all Kings and in particular of the King of England,  published in 1648, is hardly anything more than a collection of ideas expressed in the République. John Locke’s First Treatise of Government (1689) may, therefore, be considered not only a refutation of Filmer’s political ideas, but also a critical commentary upon Bodin’s political theory. Thomas Hobbes, in his The Elements of Law (1640), cites Bodin by name and approves Bodin’s opinion according to which sovereign power in the commonwealth may not be divided (II.8.7. “Of the Causes of Rebellion”). This principle of indivisible sovereign power is also expressed in Hobbes’ later political works De cive (1642) and Leviathan (1651).

10. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Oppiani De venatione (1555)
  • Oratio de instituenda iuventute… (1559)
  • Methodus ad facilem historiarum cognitionem (1566)
  • La réponse aux paradoxes de Malestroit (1568)
  • La harangue de Messire Charles des Cars (1573)
  • Les Six Livres de la République (1576; all references in this article are to the edition of 1583)
  • Apologie de Réne Herpin pour la République (before 1581)
  • Recueil de tout ce qui s’est négocié en la compagnie du tiers état… (1577)
  • Juris universi distributio (1578)
  • De la démonomanie des sorciers (1580)
  • De republica libri sex (1586)
  • Sapientiae moralis epitome (1588)
  • Paradoxon (1596)
  • Universae naturae theatrum (1596)
  • Consilia de principe recte instituendo (1602)
  • Colloquium heptaplomeres (1841)
  • Epître de Jean Bodin touchant l’institution de ses Enfans de 1586 (1841)

i. Modern Editions of Bodin’s works

1. Collected Works
  • Bodin, Jean. Oeuvres philosophiques de Jean Bodin. Ed. Pierre Mesnard. Trans. Pierre Mesnard.  Paris: PUF, 1951.
    • Includes the following Latin works, together with their French translations: Oratio de instituenda in repub. juventute ad senatum populumque tolosatemJuris universi distributio, and Methodus ad facilem historiarum cognitionem.
  • Bodin, Jean. Selected Writings on Philosophy, Religion and Politics. Ed. Paul L. Rose. Genève: Droz, 1980.
    • Includes the following seven works: Bodin’s letter to his nephew (1586), Consilium de institutione principis (1574-86), Sapientia moralis epitome (1588), Latin dedicatory letter to the Paradoxon quod nec virtus ulla in mediocritate nec summum hominis bonum in virtutis actione consistere possit (1596) and the French translation of the text, Le Paradoxe de Jean Bodin Angevin (1598), Bodin’s letter to Jean Bautru des Matras (1560s), as well as a letter to a friend in which he gives reasons for supporting the Catholic League (1590).
2. Individual Works
  • Bodin, Jean. Method for the Easy Comprehension of History. Trans. Beatrice Reynolds. New York: Columbia University Press, 1945.
    • Includes an introduction by Reynolds.
  • Bodin, Jean. Six Books of the Commonwealth. Abr. ed. Trans. Marian J. Tooley. Oxford: Basil Blackwell, 1955.
    • An abridgment of Bodin’s major work, together with an introduction.
  • Bodin, Jean. The Six Bookes of a Commonweal. Trans. Richard Knolles. Ed. Kenneth Douglas McRae. Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1962.
    • This is the only existing full English translation of the work; facsimile reprint of Knolles’ English translation of 1606 that compares the French and Latin versions of the text. McRae’s introductory material discusses Bodin’s life, his career and his influence.
  • Bodin, Jean. Address to the Senate and People of Toulouse on Education of Youth in the Commonwealth. Trans. George Albert Moore. Chevy Chase, Md: Country Dollar Press, 1965.
    • Moore’s translation of an important and interesting early text by Bodin.
  • Bodin, Jean. Colloquium of the Seven about Secrets of the Sublime. Trans. Marion Leathers Kuntz. Princeton, N. J.: Princeton University Press, 1975. Second edition. University Park, PA: Pennsylvania State University Press, 2008.
    • First complete modern translation of the work, together with highly informative introductory material.
  • Bodin, Jean. On Sovereignty. Trans. Julian H. Franklin. Ed. Julian H. Franklin. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1992.
    • Contains chapters 8 and 10 of the First book, and chapters 1 and 5 of the Second book of the République. Concentrates on Bodin’s analysis of sovereignty. Franklin’s textual notes are informative.
  • Bodin, Jean. Response to the Paradoxes of Malestroit. Trans. Henry Tudor. Eds. Henry Tudor and R. W. Dyson. Bristol: Thoemmes Continuum, 1997.
    • Most recent English translation of the text, it is based on the first edition of the work, but also included are the major changes that occurred between the first (1568) and second (1578) editions. Includes a concise and useful introduction.
  • Bodin, Jean. On the Demon-Mania of Witches. Abr. ed. Trans. Randy A. Scott and Jonathan L. Pearl. Toronto: Centre for Reformation and Renaissance Studies, 2001.
    • Abridged translation of Bodin’s Démonomanie that contains about two-thirds of the original text and informative notes.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Blair, Ann. The Theater of Nature. Jean Bodin and Renaissance Science. Princeton, N. J.: Princeton University Press, 1997.
    • Indispensable study concerning the methods and practices of Renaissance science in the light of Bodin’s Theatrum.
  • Brown, John L. The Methodus ad facilem historiarum cognitionem of Jean Bodin. Washington, D.C.: Catholic University of America Press, 1939. Reprint. New York: AMS Press, 1969.
    • Central study that analyses the background and influence of Bodin’s Methodus. Brown establishes that Bodin’s earlier work contains many of the political and legal principles that were further developed in the République.
  • Franklin, Julian H. Jean Bodin and the Rise of Absolutist Theory. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1973.
    • An influential study on the topic of the formation of Bodin’s absolutist view, as it is expressed in the République.
  • Heller, Henry. “Bodin on Slavery and Primitive Accumulation.” The Sixteenth Century Journal 25.1 (1994): 53-65.
    • Argues that Bodin conceived of slavery not only as something irrational and unnatural, but as a permanent threat to the stability of the state.
  • McRae, Kenneth D. “Ramist Tendencies in the Thought of Jean Bodin.” Journal of the History of Ideas 16.3 (1955): 306-323.
    • Argues that several of Bodin’s writings reveal the influence of Ramist concepts; even the République (in which the Ramist influence is less evident) can be described as Ramist in its structure.
  • O’Brien, Denis P. “Bodin’s Analysis of Inflation.” History of Political Economy 32.2 (2000): 267-292.
    • A longer version of the introduction that O’Brien wrote to the 1997 edition of Bodin’s Response. Argues that Bodin should be regarded as the pioneer formulator of the quantity theory of money.
  • Pearl, Jonathan L. “Humanism and Satanism: Jean Bodin’s Contribution to the Witchcraft Crisis.” Canadian Review of Sociology and Anthropology 19.4 (1982): 541-548.
    • On Bodin’s influence on the “witchcraft crisis”. Pearl reminds us that the Renaissance witnessed, not only a revival of the arts and the birth of modern science, but also the re-appearance of the occult: magic, astrology and witchcraft.
  • Remer, Gary. “Dialogues of Toleration: Erasmus and Bodin.” Review of Politics 56.2 (1994): 305-336.
    • Examines two different types of dialogues of toleration; Erasmus' common truth and Bodin's subjective. Erasmus’ traditional conception aims at the discovery of truth in religious questions; Bodin’s conception, on the contrary, does not presuppose that a common truth may be discovered, since every opinion is one part of the truth.
  • Rose, Paul Lawrence. Bodin and the Great God of Nature. The Moral and Religious Universe of a Judaiser. Genève: Droz, 1980.
    • A valuable study concerning Bodin’s ideas on religion and ethics; many of Bodin’s less-known works are considered. Rose argues that Bodin went through three religious conversions in his lifetime.
  • Salmon, John Hearsey McMillan. “The Legacy of Jean Bodin: Absolutism, Populism or Constitutionalism?” The History of Political Thought 17. Thorverton (1996): 500-522.
    • Discusses the ways in which Bodin’s ideas were understood and transformed in France’s neighboring countries during the seventeenth century.
  • Tooley, Marian J. “Bodin and the Mediaeval Theory of Climate.” Speculum 28.1 (1953): 64-83.
    • A scholarly investigation of Bodin’s medieval predecessors regarding the theory of climates. Argues that contrary to his predecessors, Bodin was more interested in the practical implications of the things he observed.
  • Ulph, Owen. “Jean Bodin and the Estates-General of 1576.” Journal of Modern History 19.4 (1947): 289-296.
    • Examines Bodin’s role, as deputy from the bailiwick of Vermandois, during the estates-general at Blois in 1576.
  • Wolfe, Martin. “Jean Bodin on Taxes: The Sovereignty-Taxes Paradox.” Political Science Quarterly 83.2 (1968): 268-284.
    • Argues that Bodin’s main objective in writing about taxes was to push for reform in France’s fiscal system.

i. Bibliography

  • Couzinet, Marie-Dominique, ed. Jean Bodin. Roma: Memini, 2001.
    • Indispensable for conducting serious research on Bodin. Contains references to over 1,500 articles, books and other documents.

ii. Conference proceedings and Article Collections

  • Denzer, Horst, ed. Jean Bodin – Proceedings of the International Conference on Bodin in Munich. München: C.H. Beck, 1973.
    • Fine collection of twenty-four articles (in English, French and German) by the foremost Bodin scholars. Part II contains discussions, and part III an exhaustive bibliography on Bodin from the year 1800 onwards.
  • Franklin, Julian H., ed. Jean Bodin. Aldershot: Ashgate, 2006.
    • Collection of twenty previously published articles or book chapters (in English).


Author Information

Tommi Lindfors
University of Helsinki

John Langshaw Austin (1911—1960)

J. L. Austin was one of the more influential British philosophers of his time, due to his rigorous thought, extraordinary personality, and innovative philosophical method. According to John Searle, he was both passionately loved and hated by his contemporaries. Like Socrates, he seemed to destroy all philosophical orthodoxy without presenting an alternative, equally comforting, orthodoxy.

Austin is best known for two major contributions to contemporary philosophy: first, his ‘linguistic phenomenology’, a peculiar method of philosophical analysis of the concepts and ways of expression of everyday language; and second, speech act theory, the idea that every use of language carries a performative dimension (in the well-known slogan, “to say something is to do something”). Speech act theory has had consequences and import in research fields as diverse as philosophy of language, ethics, political philosophy, philosophy of law, linguistics, artificial intelligence and feminist philosophy.

This article describes Austin’s linguistic method and his speech act theory, and it describes the original contributions he made to epistemology and philosophy of action. It closes by focusing on two main developments of speech act theory─the dispute between conventionalism and intentionalism, and the debate on free speech, pornography, and censorship.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Method
  2. Philosophy of Language
    1. Meaning and Truth
    2. Speech Acts
  3. Epistemology
    1. Sense and Sensibilia
    2. Other Minds
      1. Knowledge of Particular Empirical Facts
      2. Knowledge of Someone Else’s Mental States
  4. Philosophy of Action
  5. Legacy
    1. Speech Act Theory
      1. Conventionalism and Intentionalism
      2. Free Speech and Pornography
    2. Epistemology
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Life and Method

John Langshaw Austin, born on March 26th 1911 in Lancaster, England. He was trained as a classicist at Balliol College Oxford. He first came to philosophy by studying Aristotle, who deeply influenced his own philosophical method. He also worked on the philosophy of Leibniz and translated Frege’s Grundlagen. Austin spent his whole academic life in Oxford, where he was White’s Professor of Moral Philosophy from 1952 until his death in 1960. During the Second World War Austin was commissioned in the Intelligence Corps, and played a leading role in the organization of D-Day, leaving the British Army in 1945 with the rank of Lt. Colonel. Austin published only seven articles. According to Searle, Austin’s reluctance to publish was partly characteristic of his own attitude, but also it was part of the culture of Oxford at the time: “Oxford had a long tradition of not publishing during one’s lifetime, indeed it was regarded as slightly vulgar to publish” (Searle 2001, 227). Most of Austin’s work was thus published posthumously, and includes a collection of papers (Austin 1961), and two series of lectures reconstructed by the editors on the basis of Austin’s lecture notes: the lectures on perception, edited by Geoffrey Warnock (Austin 1962a), and the William James Lectures held at Harvard in 1955, devoted to speech acts, and edited by James O. Urmson (Austin 1962b) for the first edition, and by Urmson and Marina Sbisa for the second (Austin 1975).

Austin had a profound dissatisfaction not only with the traditional way of philosophizing, but also with Logical Positivism (whose leading figure in Oxford was Alfred J. Ayer). In particular, his dissatisfaction was directed towards a way of practicing philosophy which, in Austin’s view, was responsible for the production of tidy dichotomies, and instead of clarifying the problems at issue, seemed to lead to oversimplifications and dogmatic and preconceived schemes of thought. Austin thus developed a new philosophical methodology and style, which became paradigmatic of Ordinary Language Philosophy. Austin does not claim that this method is the only correct method to adopt. Rather, it represents a valuable preliminary approach to at least some of the most stubborn problems in the tradition of Western philosophy, such as those of freedom, responsibility, and perception. According to Austin, the starting point in philosophy should be the analysis of the concepts and ways of expression of everyday language, and the reconnaissance of our ordinary language. This would help to dismantle the ‘philosophical mistakes’ induced by the way philosophers use certain ordinary words, on the one hand, and, on the other, to gain access to actual features in the world picked out by the expressions we use to describe it.

Ordinary language is not the last word: in principle it can everywhere be supplemented and improved upon and superseded. Only remember, it is the first word. [Austin 1956a/1961, 185]

According to Austin, in ordinary language are deposited all the distinctions and connections established by human beings, as if our words in their daily uses “had stood up to the long test of the survival of the fittest” (Austin 1956a/1961, 182). It is necessary, first of all, to carefully consider the terminology available to us, by making a list of the expressions relevant to the domain at issue: a sort of ‘linguistic phenomenology’ carried out with the help of the dictionary and of the imagination, by searching for combinations of expressions and synonyms, devising linguistic thought-experiments and unusual contexts and scenarios, and speculating about our linguistic reactions to them. The examination of ordinary language enables us to pay attention to the richness of linguistic facts and to tackle philosophical problems from a fresh and unprejudiced perspective.

To be sure, this is not a new methodology in the history of philosophy. Still, this strategy is now carried out with distinctive meticulousness and on a large scale on the one hand, and is undertaken and evaluated collectively, so as to gain a reasonable consensus, on the other. For Austin, philosophy is not an endeavor to be pursued privately, but a collective labor. This was in fact the gist of Austin’s “Saturday mornings,” weekly meetings held during term at Oxford and attended by philosophers of language, moral philosophers and jurists. Austin’s method was better meant for philosophical discussion and research along these lines than for publication: we can nonetheless fully appreciate it in How to Do Things with Words (1962b), and in papers like “A Plea for Excuses” (1956a), and “Ifs and Cans” (1956b).

Austin’s method has been regarded by some as pedantic, as a mere insistence that all we must do is use our words carefully, with no genuine interest in the phenomena which arouse our philosophical worries. There are indeed limitations to his methodology: on the one hand, many philosophical questions still remain untouched even after a meticulous reformulation; on the other hand, our everyday language does not embody all the distinctions which could be relevant for a philosophical inquiry (compare Searle 2001, 228-229). But Austin is far from being concerned merely by language: his focus is always also on the phenomena talked about – as he says, “It takes two to make a truth” (Austin 1950/1961, 124fn; compare Martin 2007).

2. Philosophy of Language

a. Meaning and Truth

With the help of his innovative methodology, Austin takes a new stance towards our everyday language. As is well known, philosophers and logicians like Gottlob Frege, Bertrand Russell, the earlier Ludwig Wittgenstein, Alfred Tarski and Willard Quine want to build a perfect language for philosophical and scientific communication, that is, an artificial language devoid of all the ambiguities and imperfections that characterize natural languages. Conversely, ordinary language philosophers (besides Austin, the later Wittgenstein, Friedrich Waismann, Paul Grice, Peter Strawson) view natural language as an autonomous object of analysis – and its apparent imperfections as signs of richness and expressive power.

In a formal language, semantic conventions associate with each term and each sentence a fixed meaning, once and for all. By contrast, the expressions of a natural language seem essentially incomplete; as a result, it seems impossible to fully verify our everyday sentences. The meanings of our terms are only partially constrained, depending on the beliefs, desires, goals, activities, and institutions of our linguistic community. The boundaries, even when temporarily fixed, are unstable and open to new uses and new conventions in unusual situations. In "The Meaning of a Word," Austin takes into consideration different contexts of utterance of sentences containing familiar terms, in order to create unusual occasions of use: extraordinary or strange cases are meant to contrast with our intuitions and reveal moments of tension hidden in natural language. What are we to say about “It's a goldfinch” uttered about a goldfinch that "does something outrageous (explodes, quotes Mrs. Woolf, or what not)"? (Austin 1940/1961, 88). Austin’s main point is that it is in principle impossible to foresee all the possible circumstances which could lead us to modify or retract a sentence. Our everyday terms are extremely flexible, and can still be used in odd cases. Concerning “That man is neither at home nor not at home,” Austin writes: "Somehow we cannot see what this 'could mean' – there are no semantic conventions, explicit or implicit, to cover this case: yet it is not prohibited in any way – there are no limiting rules about what we might or might not say in extraordinary cases" (Austin 1940/1961, 68). Of a dead man, lying on his bed, what would we say? That he is at home? That he is not at home?

Similarly, should the utterance “France is hexagonal” be taken as true or false? According to Austin we must take into consideration the speaker’s goals and intentions, the circumstances of utterance, and the obligations we undertake in asserting something. Assertions are not simply true or false, but more or less objective, adequate, exaggerated, and rough: “‘true’ and ‘false’ […] do not stand for anything simple at all; but only for a general dimension of being a right or proper thing to say as opposed to a wrong thing, in these circumstances, to this audience, for these purposes and with these intentions” (Austin 1975, 145).

b. Speech Acts

Austin’s most celebrated contribution to contemporary philosophy is his theory of speech acts, presented in How to Do Things with Words (Austin 1975). While for philosophers interested mainly in formal languages the main function of language is describing reality, representing states of affairs and making assertions about the world, for Austin our utterances have a variety of different uses. A similar point is made in Philosophical Investigations by Wittgenstein, who underlines the “countless” uses we may put our sentences to (Wittgenstein 1953: § 23). Austin contrasts the “desperate” Wittgensteinian image of the countless uses of language with his accurate catalogue of the various speech acts we may perform – a taxonomy similar to the one employed by an entomologist trying to classify the many (but not countless) species of beetles.

Not all utterances, then, are assertions concerning states of affairs. Take Austin’s examples

(1) I name this ship the ‘Queen Elisabeth’

as uttered in the course of the launching of a ship, or

(2) I bet you sixpence it will rain tomorrow.

The utterer of (1) or (2) is not describing the launching ceremony or a bet, but doing it. By uttering these sentences we bring about new facts, “as distinguished from producing consequences in the sense of bringing about states of affairs in the ‘normal’ way, that is, changes in the natural course of events” (Austin 1975: 117): by uttering (1) or (2) we modify the social reality, institute new conventions, and undertake obligations. In the first lessons of How to Do Things with Words, Austin traces a tentative distinction between constatives and performatives, to be abandoned in the subsequent lessons. Constatives, on the one hand, are sentences like

(3) The cat is on the mat:

they aim to describe states of affairs and are assessable as true or false. Performatives like (1) and (2), on the other hand, do rather than report something: they perform acts governed by norms and institutions (such as the act of marrying or baptizing) or social conventions (such as the act of betting or promising) and do not seem assessible as true or false. This last controversial claim is not argued for (“I assert this as obvious and do not argue it,” Austin 1975, 6): the claim is only provisional and subject to revision in the light of later sections (Austin 1975, 4n).

According to Austin it is possible and fruitful to shed light on standard cases of successful communication, and to specify the conditions for the smooth functioning of a performative, by focusing on non-standard cases and communicative failures. As we have said, performatives cannot be assessed as true or false, but they are subject to different types of invalidity or failure, called “infelicities.” In some cases the attempt to perform an act fails or “misfires.” The act is “null and void” on the basis of the violation of two kinds of rules:

A.1: there must exist an accepted conventional procedure having a certain conventional effect, that procedure to include the uttering of certain words by certain persons in certain circumstances;

A.2: that procedure must be invoked in adequate circumstances and by appropriate persons.

Further infelicities concern the execution of the procedure, for it must be executed by all participants both

B.1: correctly, and

B.2: completely.

Finally, there are cases in which the performance of an act is achieved, but there is an abuse of the procedure, due to the violation of two kinds of rules:

C.1: the procedure must be executed by the speaker with appropriate thoughts, feelings or intentions;

C.2: the participants must subsequently conduct themselves in accordance with the procedure performed.

As we said, in How to Do Things with Words Austin draws the distinction between constatives and performatives merely as a preliminary to the presentation of his main thesis, namely that there is a performative dimension in any use of language. The putative class of performatives seems to admit only specific verbs (like to promise, to bet, to apologize, to order), all in the first person singular present. Any attempt to characterize the class with grammatical or lexical criteria, however, is bound to fail. We may in fact perform the act of, say, ordering by using an explicit performative, as in

(4) I order you to close the door

but also with

(5) Close the door!

Similarly, there are performative verbs also for acts of stating, asserting, or concluding, as in

(6) I assert that the Earth is flat.

The very distinction between utterances assessable along the dimension of truth and falsehood (constatives) and utterances assessable along the dimension of felicity or infelicity (performatives) is a mere illusion. To show this, Austin presents two arguments:

a) on the one hand, constatives may be assessed as happy or unhappy: like performatives, assertions require appropriate conditions for their felicitous performance (to give an example, it does not seem appropriate to make an assertion one does not believe);

b) on the other hand, performatives may be assessed in terms of truth and falsehood, or in terms of some conformity to the facts: of a verdict we say that it is fair or unfair, of a piece of advice that it is good or bad, of praise that it is deserved or not.

By a) and b) Austin is led to the conclusion that the distinction between constatives and performatives is inadequate: all sentences are tools we use in order to do something – to say something is always to do something. Therefore it is necessary to develop a general theory of the uses of language and of the acts we perform by uttering a sentence: a general theory of what Austin calls illocutionary force.

Within the same total speech act Austin distinguishes three different acts: locutionary, illocutionary and perlocutionary.

  • The locutionary act is the act of saying something, the act of uttering certain expressions, well-formed from a syntactic point of view and meaningful. It may furthermore be analyzed into a phonetic act (the act of uttering certain noises), a phatic act (the act of uttering words, that is, sounds as conforming to a certain vocabulary and grammar), and a rhetic act (the act of using these words with a certain meaning – sense or reference).
  • To perform a locutionary act is also and eo ipso to perform an illocutionary act (Austin 1975, 98). An illocutionary act is a way of using language, and its performance is the performance of an act in saying something as opposed to performance of an act of saying something. It corresponds to the force that an utterance like (5) has in a particular context: order, request, entreaty, or challenge.
  • The perlocutionary act corresponds to the effects brought about by performing an illocutionary act, to its consequences (intentional or non-intentional) on the feelings, thoughts, or actions of the participants. According to Austin the speaker, by saying what she says, performs another kind of act (like persuading, convincing, or alerting) because she can be taken as responsible for those effects (compare Sbisa 2006 and 2013). Yet the perlocutionary consequences of illocutionary acts are non-conventional, not being completely under the speaker’s control, but rather related to the specific circumstances in which the act is performed. Austin makes a further distinction between perlocutionary objects (the consequences brought about by an illocutionary act in virtue of its force – as alerting can be a consequence of the illocutionary act of warning) and perlocutionary sequels (the consequences brought about by an illocutionary act without a systematic connection to its force – as surprising can be a consequence of the illocutionary act of asserting) (Austin 1975: 118).

In the last lesson of How to Do Things with Words Austin tentatively singles out five classes of illocutionary acts, using as a starting point a list of explicit performative verbs: Verdictives, Exercitives, Commissives, Behabitives, Expositives.

  • The class of Verdictives includes acts (formal or informal) of giving a verdict, estimate, or appraisal (as acquitting, reckoning, assessing, diagnosing). These may concern facts or values.
  • The class of Exercitives includes acts of exerting powers, rights or influence (as appointing, voting, ordering, warning). These presuppose that the speaker has a certain kind of authority or influence.
  • The class of Commissives includes acts that commit the speaker to doing something (as promising, undertaking, consenting, opposing, betting).
  • The class of Expositives includes acts that clarify reasons, arguments, or communications (as affirming, denying, stating, describing, asking, answering).
  • The class of Behabitives includes acts having to do with attitudes and social behavior (as apologizing, congratulating, commending, thanking). These include reactions to other people’s behavior or fortune, and are particularly vulnerable to insincerity (condition C.1).

Austin characterizes the illocutionary act as the conventional aspect of language (to be contrasted with the perlocutionay act). As we said before, for any speech act there must exist an accepted conventional procedure having a certain conventional effect (condition A.1): if the conventional procedure is executed according to further conditions, the act is successfully performed. This claim seems plausible as far as institutional or social acts (like naming a ship, or betting) are concerned: the conventional dimension is here manifest because it is our society (and sometimes our laws) that validates those acts. The claim seems less plausible as far as speech acts in general are concerned: nothing conventional, or semantic, makes of (5) an order, or a challenge, or an entreaty – the illocutionary force of the utterance is fixed by the context of utterance. More generally, according to Austin the speaker’s intentions play only a minor role in the performance of a speech act (violation of condition C.1 leads to an abuse of the procedure, but not to a failure of the speech act). Drawing on Gricean ideas, Peter Strawson argues that what makes of (5) an illocutionary act of ordering instead of entreating are the speaker’s intentions – intentions the speaker may (but need not) make available to the audience using linguistic conventions:

I do not want to deny that there may be conventional postures or procedures for entreating… But I do want to deny that an act of entreaty can be performed only as conforming to some such conventions. What makes X's words to Y an entreaty not to go is something complex enough, no doubt relating to X's situation, attitude to Y, manner, and current intention. [Strawson 1964, 444; compare Warnock 1973 and Bach & Harnish 1979]

Marina Sbisa disagrees with Strawson’s reading of the conventionality of illocutionary acts and identifies two distinct claims in Austin’s conventionalism: (a) illocutionary acts are performed via conventional devices (like linguistic conventions); and (b) illocutionary acts produce conventional effects. Austin specifies three kinds of conventional effects: the performance of an illocutionary act involves the securing of uptake, that is, bringing about the understanding of the meaning and force of the locution; the illocutionary act takes effect in conventional ways, as distinguished from producing consequences in the sense of bringing about changes in the natural course of events; and many illocutionary acts invite by convention a response or sequel (Austin 1975, 116-117). According to Sbisa, Austin deals too briefly with the conventionality of the effects produced by illocutionary acts (b) as opposed to the conventionality of the devices by which we perform illocutionary acts (a), leaving room for Strawson’s distinction between two groups of illocutionary acts: those depending on some convention the speaker follows, and those depending on a particular kind of intention of the speaker (Sbisa 2013, 26). On this point see below, § 5.a.

3. Epistemology

There are two main examples of Austin’s philosophical method applied to epistemological issues: the paper “Other Minds” (1946), and the series of lectures Sense and Sensibilia, delivered at Oxford and Berkeley during the decade from 1947 to 1958, and published in 1962. “Other Minds” is a paper given in the homonymous symposium at joint sessions of the Mind Association and the Aristotelian Society (John Wisdom, Alfred J. Ayer, and Austin were the main participants), and its topic was a much debated one in the middle decades of the twentieth century. In Sense and Sensibilia Austin applies his linguistic analysis to the sense-data theory and the more general foundational theory of knowledge, within which sense-data played the role of the basis of the very structure of empirical knowledge, in order to gain a clarification of the concept of perception.

a. Sense and Sensibilia

These lectures represent a very detailed criticism of the claims put forward by A. J. Ayer in The Foundations of Empirical Knowledge (1940), and, to a lesser extent, of those contained in H. H. Price’s Perception (1932) and G. J. Warnock’s Berkeley (1953). Austin challenges the sense-data theory, according to which we never directly perceive material objects. On the contrary, it is claimed by such theory, we perceive nothing but sense-data.

The notion of sense-data is introduced to identify the object of perception in abnormal, exceptional cases, for example, refraction, mirages, mirror-images, hallucinations, and so forth. In such cases perceptions can either be ‘qualitatively delusive’ or ‘existentially delusive,’ depending on whether sense-data endow material things with qualities that they do not really possess, or the material things presented do not exist at all. In all such cases, the sense-data theorist maintains, we directly perceive sense-data. The subsequent step in this argument, named the argument from illusion, is to claim that in ordinary cases too we directly perceive merely sense-data.

Austin’s goal is not to answer the question “What are the objects of perception?” Austin aims to get rid of “such illusions as ‘the argument from illusion’” on the one hand, and to offer on the other a “technique for dissolving philosophical worries” by clarifying the meaning of words such as ‘real,’ ‘look,’ ‘appear’ and ‘seem’ (Austin 1962a, 4-5). The argument from illusion amounts to a misconception inasmuch as it introduces a bogus dichotomy: that between sense-data and material objects. Austin challenges this dichotomy, and the subsequent claim that abnormal, illusory perceptions do not differ from normal, veridical ones in terms of quality (in both cases sense-data are perceived, though in different degrees), by presenting different cases of perceptions in order to show that “there is no one kind of thing that we ‘perceive’ but many different kinds, the number being reducible if at all by scientific investigation and not by philosophy” (Austin 1962a, 4).

Besides chairs, tables, pens and cigarettes, indicated by the sense-data theorist as examples of material objects, Austin draws attention to rainbows, shadows, flames, vapors and gases as cases of things we ordinarily say that we perceive, even though we would not classify them as material things. Likewise, Austin argues, there is no single way in which we are ‘deceived by senses’ (that is, to perceive something unreal or not material), but “things may go wrong […] in lots of different ways – which don’t have to be, and must not be assumed to be, classifiable in any general fashion” (Austin 1962a, 13). Moreover, Austin asks whether we would be prone to speak of ‘illusions’ with reference to dreams, phenomena of perspective, photos, mirror-images or pictures on the screen at the cinema. By recalling the familiarity of the circumstances in which we encounter these phenomena and the ways in which we ordinarily consider them, Austin intends to show how the dichotomies between sense-data and material objects, and between illusory perceptions and veridical ones, are in fact spurious alternatives.

The facts of perceptions are “diverse and complicated” and the analysis of words in their contexts of use enables us to make the subtle distinctions obliterated by the “obsession” some philosophers have for certain words (for example, ‘real’ and ‘reality’), and by the lack of attention to the (not even remotely interchangeable) uses of verbs like ‘look,’ ‘appear,’ and ‘seem.’ The way the sense-data theorists use the words ‘real’ and ‘directly’ in the argument from illusion is not the ordinary use of these words, but a new use, which nevertheless fails to be explained. Austin does not want to rule out the possibility of tracing, for theoretical purposes, new distinctions, and thus of emending our linguistic practices by introducing technical terms, but he rather proposes always to pay attention to the ordinary uses of our words, in order to avoid oversimplifications and distortions.

As an example, Austin examines the word ‘real’ and contrasts the ordinary, firmly established meanings of that word as fixed by the everyday ways we use it to the ways it is used by sense-data theorists in their arguments. What Austin recommends is a careful consideration of the ordinary, multifarious meanings of that word in order not to posit, for example, a non-natural quality designed by that word, common to all the things to which that word is attributed (‘real ducks,’ ‘real cream,’ ‘real progress,’ ‘real color,’ ‘real shape,’ and so forth).

Austin highlights the complexities proper to the uses of ‘real’ by observing that it is (i) a substantive-hungry word that often plays the role of (ii) adjuster-word, a word by means of which “other words are adjusted to meet the innumerable and unforeseeable demands of world upon language” (Austin 1962a, 73). Like ‘good,’ it is (iii) a dimension-word, that is, “the most general and comprehensive term in a whole group of terms of the same kind, terms that fulfil the same function” (Austin 1962a, 71): that is, ‘true,’ ‘proper,’ ‘genuine,’ ‘live,’ ‘natural,’ ‘authentic,’ as opposed to terms such as ‘false,’ ‘artificial,’ ‘fake,’ ‘bogus,’ ‘synthetic,’ ‘toy,’ but also to nouns like ‘dream,’ ‘illusion,’ ‘mirage,’ ‘hallucination.’ ‘Real,’ is also (iv) a word whose negative use “wears the trousers” (a trouser-word) (Austin 1962a, 70).

In order to determine the meaning of ‘real’ we have to consider, case by case, the ways and contexts in which it is used. Only by doing so, according to Austin, can we avoid introducing false dichotomies (for a criticism of Austin’s attack on sense-data see Ayer 1967 and Smith 2002).

b. Other Minds

In this paper Austin tackles the philosophical problems of the possibility of knowing someone else’s mental states (for example, that another man is angry) and of the reliability of the reasons to which we appeal when we justify our assertions about particular empirical facts (for example, that the bird moving around my garden is a goldfinch). The target of Austin’s analysis is the skeptical outcome of the challenge of such a possibility on the part of certain philosophers (in this case Austin is addressing some of John Wisdom’s contentions). As to the knowledge of particular empirical facts, given that “human intellect and senses are, indeed, inherently fallible and delusive” (Austin 1946/1961, 98), the skeptic claims that we should never, or almost never, say that we know something, except for what I can perceive with my senses now, for example, “Here is something that looks red to me now.” On the other hand, the possibility of knowing someone else’s mental states is challenged by means of the idea of a privileged access to our own sensations and mental states, such that only about them can we not ‘be wrong’ “in the most favoured sense” (Austin 1946/1961, 90).

i. Knowledge of Particular Empirical Facts

Austin engages in an examination of the kinds of answers we would provide, in ordinary, concrete and specific circumstances, to challenges to our claims of knowledge. For instance, in responding to someone’s question, “How do you know?” in the face of my claim “That is a goldfinch,” my answer could appeal to my past experience, by virtue of which I have learned something about goldfinches, and hence to the criteria for determining that something is a goldfinch, or to the circumstances of the current case, which enable me to determine that the bird moving around my garden now is a goldfinch. The ways in which, in ordinary circumstances, our claims can be challenged, or be wrong, are specific (ways that the context helps us to determine), and there are recognized procedures appropriate to the particular type of case to which we can appeal to justify or verify such claims.

The precautions to take, in ordinary cases, in order to claim to know something “cannot be more than reasonable, relative to current intents and purposes” (Austin 1946/1961, 88), inasmuch as in order to suppose that one is mistaken there must be some concrete reason relative to the specific case. On the contrary, the “wile of the metaphysician,” Austin claims, amounts to phrasing her doubts and questions in a very general way, and “not specifying or limiting what may be wrong,” “so that I feel at a loss ‘how to prove’” what she has challenged (Austin 1946/1961, 87).

By drawing a parallel with the performative formula ‘I promise,’ Austin claims that in uttering ‘I know’ the speaker does not describe her mental state (this would be, in Austin’s terms, a descriptive fallacy). Rather, in the appropriate circumstances, she does something: she gives others her word, that is, her authority for saying that ‘S is P.’

Austin’s analysis of the epistemological terms in their ordinary, specific uses is meant to determine the conditions under which our claims are felicitous, successful speech acts. These conditions are the ones we typically appeal to in order to justify our claims of knowledge should they be challenged.

Whether Austin’s strategy proves to be successful against the skeptical challenge, which rests on a metaphysical and logical possibility, is a further issue to be resolved.

ii. Knowledge of Someone Else’s Mental States

Austin objects to the idea (as claimed for example, by Wisdom) that we know (if ever we do) someone else’s feelings only from the physical symptoms of these feelings: we never know someone else’s feelings in themselves, as we know our own. According to Austin, claims about someone else’s mental states can be tackled like those about particular empirical facts, even though the former are more complex, owing to “the very special nature (grammar, logic) of feelings” (Austin 1946/1961, 105). It is on this special nature that the analysis of Austin in this paper is meant to shed light.

To affirm of someone, ‘I know he is angry,’ requires, on the one hand, a certain familiarity with the person to whom we are attributing the feeling; in particular, familiarity in situations of the same type as the current one. On the other hand, it seems to be necessary to have had a first-person experience of the relevant feeling/emotion.

A feeling (say anger), Austin claims, presents a close connection both with its natural expressions/manifestations, and with the natural occasions of those manifestations, so that “it seems fair to say that ‘being angry’ is in many respects like ‘having mumps’. It is a description of a whole pattern of events, including occasion, symptoms, feeling and manifestation, and possibly other factors besides” (Austin 1946/1961, 109).

Against Wisdom’s claim that we never get at someone else’s anger, but only at the symptoms/signs of his anger, Austin draws attention to the ways we talk about others’ feelings, and highlights the general pattern of events “peculiar to the case of ‘feelings’ (emotions)” on which our attributions are based (Austin 1946/1961, 110). Moreover, emphasis is placed on the fact that in order for feelings and emotions to be attributed, and also self-attributed, a problem of recognition, and of familiarity with the complexities of such pattern, seems to be in place, due to the very way in which the uses of the relevant terms have been learnt.

Emotion terms, for their part, are vague, for, on the one hand, they are often applied to a wide range of situations, while on the other, the patterns they cover are rather complex, such that in “unorthodox” cases there may be hesitation in attribution. Apart from this kind of intrinsic vagueness, doubts may arise as to the correctness of a feeling attribution, or its authenticity, due to cases of misunderstanding or deception. But these cases are special ones, and there are, as in the goldfinch case, “established procedures” for dealing with them.

Unlike the goldfinch case, in which “sensa are dumb” (Austin 1946/1961, 97), in the case of feeling attribution a special place is occupied, within its complex pattern of events, by “the man’s own statement as to what his feelings are” (Austin 1946/1961, 113). According to Austin, “believing in other persons, in authority and testimony, is an essential part of the act of communicating, an act which we all constantly perform. It is as much an irreducible part of our experience as, say, giving promises, or playing competitive games, or even sensing coloured patches” (Austin 1946/1961, 115). Austin thus aims at blocking the skeptical argument by claiming that the possibility of knowing others’ states of minds and feelings is a constitutive feature of our ordinary practices as such, for which there is no “justification” (ibid.). Again, it may still be open to contention whether this is sufficient to refute skepticism.

4. Philosophy of Action

Austin’s contribution to the philosophy of action is traceable mainly to two papers: “A Plea for Excuses” (1956a) and “Three Ways of Spilling Ink” (1966), where the notions of  ‘doing an action,’ and ‘doing something’ are clarified by means of the linguistic analysis of excuses, that is, by considering “the different ways, and different words, in which on occasion we may try to get out of things, to show that we didn’t act ‘freely’ or were not ‘responsible’” (Austin 1966/1961, 273). According to the method dear to Austin, through the analysis of abnormal cases, or failures, it is possible to throw light on the normal and standard cases. An examination of excuses should enable us to gain an understanding of the notion of action, by means of the preliminary elucidation of the notions of responsibility and freedom.

As for the case of ‘knowing,’ Austin’s contribution is one of clarification of use, which sheds light on the notion of ‘doing an action.’

According to Austin, from the analysis of the modifying expressions occurring in excuses (for example, ‘unwittingly,’ ‘impulsively’) and in accusations (‘deliberately,’ ‘purposely,’ ‘on purpose’), it is possible to classify the different breakdowns affecting actions, and thus to dismantle the complex internal details of the machinery of action. Far from being reducible to merely making some bodily movements, doing an action is organized into different stages: the intelligence, the appreciation of the situation, the planning, the decision, and the execution. Moreover, apart from the stages, “we can generally split up what might be named as one action in several distinct ways, into different stretches or phases” (Austin 1956a/1961, 201). In particular, by using a certain term to describe what someone did, we can cover either a smaller or larger stretch of events, distinguishing the act from its consequences, results, or effects. Austin thus points out that it is crucial to determine ‘what modifies what,’ that is, what is being excused, because of the different possible ways in which it is possible to refer to ‘what she did.’ Depending on the way we delimit the act, we may hold a person responsible or not, hence it is extremely important to determine with precision what is being justified.

In order to ascertain someone’s responsibility for a certain action, for example, a child that has spilled ink in class, it is necessary to consider as distinct cases whether he did it ‘intentionally,’ ‘deliberately,’ or ‘on purpose.’ Austin reveals the differences among the three terms in two steps. First, he considers imaginary actions the description of which presents two of the terms as expressly dissociated: for example, to do something intentionally, but not deliberately (for example, to impulsively stretch out one's hand to make things up at the end of a quarrel; see Austin 1966/1961, 276-277); intentionally, but not on purpose (for example, to act wantonly); deliberately, but not intentionally (for example, unintended, though foreseeable, consequences/results of some actions of mine – to ruin one’s debtor by insisting on payment of due debts; see Austin 1966/1961, 278); and on purpose, but not intentionally (this last case seems to verge on impossibility, and has a paradoxical flavor). The logical limits of these combinations enable Austin to single out the differences among the concepts under investigation. Subsequently, as a second step, such differences are made apparent by an analysis of the grammar and philology of the terms (adjectival terminations, negative forms, the prepositions used to form adverbial expressions, and so forth). From this examination each term turns out to mark different ways in which it is possible to do an action, or different ‘aspects’ of action.

Austin’s analysis of the notions of action and responsibility casts light on that of freedom, which is clarified by the examination of “all the ways in which each action may not be ‘free’” (Austin 1956a/1961, 180). Like the word ‘real,’ also in the case of ‘free’ it is the negative use that wears the trousers: the notion of freedom derives its meaning from the concepts excluded, case by case, by each use of the term ‘free’ (for example, consider the following utterances: “I had to escape, since he threatened me with a knife;” “The glass slipped out of my hand because of my astonishment;” “I can’t help checking the email every five minutes”). By considering the specific, ordinary situations in which it is possible or not to ascertain someone’s responsibility for an act (where an issue of responsibility arises), the notions of freedom and responsibility emerge as closely intertwined. In Austin’s words: “As ‘truth’ is not a name for a characteristic of assertions, so ‘freedom’ is not a name for a characteristic of actions, but a name of a dimension in which actions are assessed” (Austin 1956a/1961, 180). Austin does not provide a positive account of the notion of freedom: it is rather elucidated through attention to the different ways in which our actions may be free.

5. Legacy

a. Speech Act Theory

Since the end of the 1960s Speech Act Theory (SAT) has been developed in many directions. Here we will concentrate on two main strands: the dispute between conventionalism and intentionalism on the one hand, and the debate on pornography, free speech, and censorship on the other.

i. Conventionalism and Intentionalism

Peter Strawson’s contribution to Austin’s SAT, with ideas drawn from Paul Grice’s analysis of the notion of non-natural meaning, marks the beginning of the dispute over the role played by convention and intention respectively in the performance of speech acts. Although almost all the developments of SAT contain, in different degrees, both a conventionalist and an intentionalist element, it may be useful to distinguish two main traditions, depending on the preponderance of one element over the other: a conventionalist, Austinian tradition, and an intentionalist, neo-Gricean one. There are two versions of conventionalism: John Searle’s conventionalism of the means, and Marina Sbisa’s conventionalism of the effects (the distinction is marked by Sbisa).

Central to Searle’s systematization of SAT is the hypothesis that speaking a language amounts to being engaged in a rule-governed activity, and that human languages may be regarded as the conventional realizations of a set of underlying constitutive rules, that is, rules that create, rather than just regulate, an activity, to the effect that the existence of such activity logically depends on that of the rules constituting it. Searle’s analysis aims at specifying a set of necessary and sufficient conditions for the successful performance of an illocutionary act (Searle concentrates on the act of promising, but the analysis is further extended to the other types of illocutionary acts, of which several classifications have been developed within SAT). Starting from the felicitous conditions for the performance of an act, a set of semantic rules for the use of ‘the illocutionary force indicating device for that act is extracted. Searle’s position thus qualifies as a conventionalism of the means because the felicitous performance of an illocutionary act obtains thanks to the conformity of the meaning of the utterance used to perform it to the linguistic conventions proper to the language within which the act is performed.

Sbisa developed Austin’s thesis of the conventionality of the illocutionary force by linking it to the second of the three kinds of conventional effects characteristic of the illocutionary act: the production of states of affairs in a way different from natural causation, namely, the production of normative states of affairs, such as obligations, commitments, entitlements, rights, and so forth. According to Sbisa, each type of illocutionary act produces specific conventional effects, which correspond to “assignments to or cancellations from each one of the participants of modal predicates” (Sbisa 2001, 1797), which are conventional insofar as their production depends on intersubjective agreement. The hallmark of such effects is, unlike physical actions, their being liable to annulment, their defeasibility.

The main exemplification of the intentionalist tradition within SAT is the analysis developed by Kent Bach and Robert Harnish. In the opposite direction relative to Searle’s views, Bach and Harnish claim that the link between the linguistic structure of an utterance and the illocutionary act it serves to perform is never semantic, or conventional, but rather inferential.

In order for the illocutionary act to be determined by the hearer, in addition to ‘what is said’ (the semantic content of the utterance), the following are also necessary: the speaker’s illocutionary communicative intention (this intention is reflexive: its fulfillment consists in its being recognized, on the part of the hearer, as intended to be recognized); the contextual beliefs shared by the interlocutors; general beliefs about the communicative situation which play the role of presumptions, that is, expectations about the interlocutor’s behavior which are so basic that they constitute the very conditions of possibility of the communicative exchange (for example, the belief of belonging to the same linguistic community, and that in force to the effect that whenever a member of the community utters an expression, she is doing so with some recognizable illocutionary intent); and, finally, conversational assumptions, drawn from Gricean conversational maxims.

All these elements combine to bring about the inference that enables the hearer to move from the level of the utterance act up to the illocutionary level, going through the locutionary one (note that Bach and Harnish, and Searle himself, part company with Austin in distinguishing the components of the speech act). Bach and Harnish put forward a model, the Speech Act Schema (SAS), which represents the pattern of the inference a hearer follows (and that the speaker intends that she follow) in order to understand the illocutionary act as an act of a certain type (as an order, a promise, an assertion, and so forth).

The merit of the intentionalist analysis offered by Bach and Harnish is that it attempts to integrate SAT within a global account of linguistic communication whose aim is to provide a psychologically plausible account. A shortcoming of this approach seems to be concerned with an essential element of SAT itself: the emphasis put on the normative dimension produced by the performance of speech acts. The intentionalist analysis fails to provide an account of such a normative dimension, since it is maintained that the creation of commitments and obligations is a “moral” question not answerable by SAT. On the other hand, the conventionalist tradition in both its variants seems to show an opposite and equally unsatisfactory tendency. It has in fact been argued, specifically by relevance theorists (see Sperber and Wilson 1995), that the illocutionary level, as identified by SAT, does not effectively play a role in the process of linguistic comprehension. That it does play such a role, as the SAT claims, is an unjustified hypothesis, so runs the relevance theorists’ objection. More generally, this objection urges speech act theorists to confront the cognitive turn in the philosophy of language and linguistics.

ii. Free Speech and Pornography

One more surprising applications of Speech Act Theory concerns the debate on free speech, pornography and censorship (compare Langton 1993, Hornsby 1993, Hornsby & Langton 1998, Saul 2006, Bianchi 2008). Liberal defenders of pornography maintain that pornography – even when violent and degrading – should be protected to defend a fundamental principle: the right to freedom of speech or expression. Conversely, Catharine MacKinnon claims that pornography violates women's right to free speech: more precisely pornography not only causes the subordination and silencing of women, but it also constitutes women’s subordination (a violation of their civil right to equal civil status) and silencing (a violation of their civil right to freedom of speech; MacKinnon 1987). MacKinnon's thesis has been widely discussed and criticized. Rae Langton and Jennifer Hornsby offer a defence of her claim in terms of Austin’s speech act theory: works of pornography can be understood as illocutionary acts of subordinating women or of silencing women. On the one hand, pornography (or at least violent and degrading pornography where women are portrayed as willing sexual objects) subordinates women by ranking them as inferior and legitimizing discrimination against them. On the other hand, pornography silences women by creating a communicative environment that deprives them of their illocutionary potential. The claim that pornography silences women can be analysed along the lines drawn by Austin. According to Langton (1993), one may prevent the performance of a locutionary act by preventing the utterance of certain expressions, using physical violence, institutional norms, or intimidation (locutionary silence). Or one may prevent the performance of a perlocutionary act by disregarding the illocutionary act, even if felicitously achieved (perlocutionary frustration). Or else one may prevent the performance of an illocutionary act by creating a communicative environment that precludes the uptake of the force of the speech act, or the recognition of the speaker’s authority, particularly with respect to women’s refusals of unwanted sex (illocutionary disablement). Indeed in Langton and Hornsby’s perspective, pornography might prevent women from performing the illocutionary act of refusing sex – by contributing to situations where a woman’s ‘No’ is not recognized as a refusal, and rape occurs as a result. Against the protection of pornography as a form of expression (a simple form of locution), Langton and Hornsby argue that pornography does more than simply express: it acts to silence the expressions of women (a form of illocution), thereby restricting their freedom of speech. We are thus confronted with two different, and conflicting, rights or, better, with different people in conflict over the same right, the right to free speech.

b. Epistemology

Austin’s legacy has been taken up in epistemology by individual authors such as Charles Travis (2004), who, with regard to the debate about the nature of perception, claims it to be nonrepresentational, and, along the same lines, by Michael G. F. Martin (2002), who defends a form of nonrepresentational realism.

Austin’s work may be considered as a source of inspiration for contextualism in epistemology, but some scholars tend to resist tracing much affinity by pointing out important differences between Austin’s method and the contextualist approach (see, for example, Baz 2012 and McMyler 2011).

More generally, Mark Kaplan (2000, 2008) has insisted on the necessity of considering our ordinary practices of knowledge attribution as a methodological constraint for epistemology, in order for it to preserve its own intellectual integrity. According to Kaplan, the adoption of an Austinian methodology in epistemology would undermine skeptical arguments about knowledge.

Such an Austinian trend is surely a minority one within the epistemological scenery, but later contributions (Gustafsson and Sørli 2011, Baz 2012) have shown how Austin’s method can play a significant role in dealing with several issues in the contemporary philosophical agenda, in epistemology and philosophy of language in particular.

6. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Austin, John L. 1940. “The Meaning of a Word.” The Moral Sciences Club of the University of Cambridge and the Jowett Society of the University of Oxford. Printed in 1961, James O. Urmson and Geoffrey J. Warnock (eds.), Philosophical Papers (pp. 55-75). Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Austin, John L. 1946. “Other Minds.” Proceedings of the Aristotelian SocietySupplementary Volumes 20, 148-187. Reprinted in 1961, James O. Urmson and Geoffrey J. Warnock (eds.), Philosophical Papers (pp. 76-116). Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Austin, John L. 1950. “Truth.” Proceedings of the Aristotelian SocietySupplementary Volumes 24, 111-128. Reprinted in 1961, James O. Urmson and Geoffrey J. Warnock (eds.), Philosophical Papers (pp. 117-133). Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Austin, John L. 1956a. “A Plea for Excuses.” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society 57, 1-30. Reprinted in 1961, James O. Urmson and Geoffrey J. Warnock (eds.), Philosophical Papers (pp. 175-204). Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Austin, John L. 1956b. “Ifs and Cans.” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society 42, 109-132. Reprinted in 1961, James O. Urmson and Geoffrey J. Warnock (eds.), Philosophical Papers (pp. 205-232). Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Austin, John L. 1961. Philosophical Papers. J. O. Urmson and G. J. Warnock (eds.), Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Austin, John L. 1962a. Sense and Sensibilia, G. J. Warnock (ed.). Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Austin, John L. 1962b. How to Do Things with Words. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Austin, John L. 1966. “Three Ways of Spilling Ink.” The Philosophical Review 75, 427-440. Printed in 1961, James O. Urmson and Geoffrey J. Warnock (eds.), Philosophical Papers (pp. 272-287). Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Austin, John L. 1975. How to Do Things with Words, James O. Urmson and Marina Sbisa (eds.). Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2nd edition.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Ayer, Alfred J. 1940. The Foundations of Empirical Knowledge. New York: MacMillan.
  • Ayer, Alfred J. 1967. “Has Austin Refuted the Sense-Datum Theory?” Synthese 17, 117-140.
  • Bach, Kent, and Harnish, Robert M. 1979. Linguistic Communication and Speech Acts. Cambridge: MIT Press.
    • The most important development of Speech Act Theory in an intentionalist/inferentialist framework of linguistic communication.
  • Baz, Avner. 2012. When Words Are Called For: A Defense of Ordinary Language Philosophy. Cambridge: Harvard University Press.
    • Arguments against Ordinary Language Philosophy are scrutinized and dismantled, and its general method is applied to the debate about the reliance on intuitions in philosophy, and to that between contextualism and anti-contextualism with respect to knowledge.
  • Berlin, Isaiah, Forguson, Lynd W., Pears, David F., Pitcher, George, Searle, John R., Strawson, Peter F., and Warnock, Geoffrey J. (Eds.). 1973. Essays on J. L. Austin. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
    • Together with Fann 1969, the most important collection of papers on Austin.
  • Bianchi, Claudia. 2008. “Indexicals, Speech Acts and Pornography.” Analysis 68, 310-316.
    • A defense of Langton’s thesis according to which works of pornography can be understood as illocutionary acts of silencing women.
  • Fann, Kuang T. (Ed.). 1969. Symposium on J. L. Austin. London: Routledge & Kegan Paul.
    • The standard anthology on Austin’s philosophy, with papers by several of Austin’s colleagues and students.
  • Gustafsson, Martin, and Sørli, Richard. (Eds.). 2011. The Philosophy of J. L. Austin. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • A collection of essays, aiming to reassess the importance of Austin’s philosophy by developing his ideas in connection with several issues in the contemporary philosophical agenda, especially in epistemology and philosophy of language.
  • Hornsby, Jennifer. 1993. “Speech Acts and Pornography.” Women’s Philosophy Review 10, 38-45.
  • Hornsby, Jennifer, and Langton, Rae. 1998. “Free Speech and Illocution.” Legal Theory 4, 21-37.
    • An analysis of works of pornography as illocutionary acts of subordinating women, or illocutionary acts of silencing women.
  • Kaplan, Mark. 2000. “To What Must an Epistemology Be True?” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 61, 279-304.
  • Kaplan, Mark. 2008. “Austin’s Way with Skepticism.” In John Greco (ed.), The Oxford Handbook of Skepticism (pp. 348-371). Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • Kaplan draws attention to the ordinary practices of knowledge attribution as a methodological constraint epistemology should respect, and as a move that would undermine skeptical arguments about knowledge.
  • Langton, Rae. 1993. “Speech Acts and Unspeakable Acts.” Philosophy and Public Affairs 22, 293-330.
    • A discussion of pornography as a kind of speech act.
  • MacKinnon, Catharine. 1987. “Francis Biddle’s Sister: Pornography, Civil Rights and Speech.” In Catharine MacKinnon (ed.), Feminism Unmodified: Discourses on Life and Law (pp. 163-197). Cambridge: Harvard University Press.
    • A passionate plea against pornography as a violation of women's civil rights.
  • Martin, Michael G. F. 2002. “The Transparency of Experience.” Mind and Language 17, 376-425.
  • Martin, Michael G. F. 2007. “Austin: Sense and Sensibilia Revisited.” London Philosophy Papers, 1-31.
    • Austin’s work on perception is discussed in relation with disjunctive theories of perception (Martin 2007), and a nonrepresentational realist account of perception is put forward (Martin 2002).
  • McMyler, Benjamin. 2011. “Believing What the Man Says about His Own Feelings.” In Martin Gustafsson and Richard Sørli (eds.), The Philosophy of J. L. Austin (pp. 114-145). Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Price, Henry H. (1932). Perception. London: Methuen & Co.
  • Saul, Jennifer. 2006. “Pornography, Speech Acts and Context.” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society 106, 229-248.
    • A criticism of Langton’s thesis.
  • Sbisa, Marina. 2001. “Illocutionary Force and Degrees of Strength in Language Use.” Journal of Pragmatics 33, 1791-1814.
  • Sbisa, Marina. 2006. “Speech Act Theory.” In Jef Verschueren and Jan-Ola Oestman (eds.), Key Notions for Pragmatics: Handbook of Pragmatics Highlights, Volume 1 (pp. 229-244). Amsterdam: John Benjamins.
  • Sbisa, Marina. 2013. “Locution, Illocution, Perlocution.” In Marina Sbisa and Ken Turner (eds.), Pragmatics of Speech Actions: Handbooks of Pragmatics, Volume 2. Berlin: Mouton de Gruyter.
    • An overview of Austin’s distinction and of its reformulations.
  • Sbisa, Marina, and Turner, Ken (Eds.) 2013. Pragmatics of Speech Actions: Handbooks of Pragmatics, Volume 2. Berlin: Mouton de Gruyter.
  • Searle, John. 2001. “J. L. Austin (1911-1960).” In Aloysius P. Martinich and David Sosa (eds.), A Companion to Analytic Philosophy (pp. 218-230). Oxford: Blackwell.
    • A biographical sketch and brief discussion of Austin’s speech act theory.
  • Smith, Arthur D. 2002. The Problem of Perception. Cambridge: Harvard University Press.
  • Sperber, Dan, and Wilson, Deirdre. 1986. Relevance: Communication and Cognition. Oxford: Blackwell.
    • Chapter 4, §10 presents a criticism of Speech Act Theory.
  • Strawson, Peter F. 1964. “Intention and Convention in Speech Acts.” Philosophical Review 73, 439-460.
    • The paper that first discussed the role of conventional and intentional elements in the performance of speech acts.
  • Travis, Charles. 2004. “The Silence of the Senses.” Mind 113, 57-94.
    • Nonrepresentationalism about perception is defended, along Austin-inspired lines.
  • Warnock, Geoffrey J. 1953. Berkeley. Harmondsworth: Penguin Books.
  • Warnock, Geoffrey J. 1973. “Some Types of Performative Utterances.” In Isaiah Berlin, Lynd W. Forguson, David F. Pears, George Pitcher, John R. Searle, Peter F. Strawson and Geoffrey J. Warnock (eds.), Essays on J. L. Austin (pp. 69-89). Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Wittgenstein, Ludwig. 1953. Philosophical Investigations. Gertrude E. M. Anscombe (trans.). Oxford: Blackwell.
    • A discussion of the countless uses we may put our sentences to.


Author Information

Federica Berdini
University of Bologna


Claudia Bianchi
Vita-Salute San Raffaele University

Gianni Vattimo (1936− )

Gianni Vattimo is an Italian philosopher and cultural commentator. He studied in Turin, Italy with Luigi Pareyson, and in Heidelberg under Hans-Georg Gadamer. Central to Vattimo's philosophy are the existentialist and proto-postmodernist influences of Nietzsche, Heidegger, Gadamer and Kuhn. He has also become prominent outside of philosophical circles through his political activism in supporting gay rights and from his position as a Member of the European Parliament. His ideas have had a wide-ranging influence across disciplines such as feminism, theology, sexuality studies, and globalisation.

In his philosophy Vattimo explores the relationship between postmodernism and nihilism, treating nihilism affirmatively rather than as something to be overcome. Vattimo draws upon both the theoretical work of Nietzsche and Heidegger, and the ‘signs of the times’. By the latter Vattimo refers to the social and political pluralism and the absence of metaphysical foundations that he believes characterise late modernity, a term Vattimo uses to refer to advanced societies in their present state to show their connection to modernity; the term ‘postmodern’ implies more discontinuity than Vattimo would like. Vattimo thinks that in developed societies there is a ‘plurality of interpretations’ because through the media and ever-increasing movement of peoples it is no longer possible to believe in one dominant way of seeing the world. The freeing-up of these interpretations is possible, Vattimo thinks, because one can no longer plausibly conceive Being as a foundation, that is, of the universe as a rational metaphysically-ordered system of causes and effects. In turn, the lack of plausibility in foundationalism is due to the ‘event’ of the death of God (both the idea of Being as foundation and the event of the death of God shall be explained in due course).  A significant portion of Vattimo’s work is devoted to explaining how the only plausible late-modern, Western philosophical outlook is ‘hermeneutical nihilism’. Broadly, this is the view that ‘there are no facts, only interpretations’, to use a phrase from Nietzsche’s unpublished notebooks (Colli and Montinari, 1967, VIII.1, 323, 7 [60]). Vattimo also investigates the implications of this position for religion, politics, ethics, art, technology, and the media.

Vattimo is well known for his philosophical style of ‘weak thought’ (pensiero debole). ‘Weak thought’ is an attempt to understand and re-configure traces from the history of thought in ways that accord with postmodern conditions. In doing so, the aim of ‘weak thought’ is to create an ethic of ‘weakness’. Vattimo’s efforts to create a postmodern ethic are closely related to his return to religion from the late 1980s onwards, a significant point in his own intellectual development. His renewed interest in religion has also acted as a blueprint for a return to philosophical engagement with, and commitment to, Communism.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. The End of History
  3. Hermeneutical Nihilism
    1. The End of History, Nihilism, and Nietzsche’s ‘Death of God’
    2. Heidegger: Being, Technology and Nihilism
    3. Ontology, ‘Exchange Value’ as Language, and Verwindung as Resignation
    4. ‘Weak Thought,’ Hermeneutics and Verwindung as Convalescence-Alteration
  4. Return to Religion
    1. Reasons behind Vattimo’s Return to Religion
    2. The Philosophical Importance of the Christian Message in Vattimo’s Thought
  5. Ethics
  6. Political Philosophy
  7. References and Further Reading
    1. Works by Vattimo
    2. Works on Vattimo
    3. Other Works Cited

1. Life

Gianni Vattimo was born on January 4, 1936, in Turin, Italy. He was sent to an oratory school as a child. This strongly Catholic environment led to him becoming involved with Catholic youth groups such as Azione Cattolica. After completing his schooling, Vattimo studied at the University of Turin under Luigi Pareyson. He graduated in 1959 with a thesis on Aristotle that was published in 1961. To fund his studies Vattimo found employment as a television host and at a local high school. At the same time, Vattimo was working increasingly closely with Pareyson. Throughout this period Vattimo was also involved in activism, including protests against South African apartheid.

Vattimo has stated that he stopped being a Catholic when, after having gone to study in Germany, he ‘no longer read the Italian newspapers’ (Vattimo and Paterlini, 2009: 27). By this remark, he sought to imply that Catholicism and Italian culture were closely linked at the time. In 1963, Vattimo had taken up a two-year Humboldt Fellowship and was living in Heidelberg, Germany, studying under Karl Löwith and Hans-Georg Gadamer. Returning to Turin after his fellowship ended, Vattimo took up a position as adjunct professor at the university in 1964 to teach aesthetics, especially those of Heidegger. In 1968 Vattimo became a full professor of aesthetics at the University of Turin. In 1969, Vattimo finished his translation of Gadamer’s Truth and Method into Italian (it was published in 1970). During the 1970s Vattimo published many books, including his personal favourite, the 1974 work Il soggetto e la maschera (‘The subject and the mask’).

To Pareyson’s dismay, Vattimo became a Maoist after reading Mao’s works while in hospital in 1968. However, Vattimo was not seen as revolutionary enough by some groups. In 1978, the Red Brigades threatened Vattimo, spreading information to the media about Vattimo’s homosexuality. Moreover, some of Vattimo’s students were involved in terrorism around this time. When Vattimo received letters from some of his imprisoned students, he realised that they were attempting to justify their actions on metaphysical grounds. These events contributed to Vattimo reconsidering his own theoretical position. The fruit of this reflection was Vattimo’s notion of ‘weak thought’: that the history of Western metaphysics is a history of the weakening of strong structures (epistemic structures that purport to provide thinking with firm principles and criteria for judgement), and that philosophy should be an ‘adventure of difference’. Through these claims, Vattimo attempts to express the view that one should not aim for fixed philosophical solutions or for certainty with regard to knowledge. Rather, one should embrace the endless play of interpretations constitutive of late modernity. During this period Vattimo wrote some of his most well-known books, such as The End of Modernity and The Transparent Society.

There are recurrent themes and beliefs in Vattimo’s life, especially the philosophies of Nietzsche and Heidegger, Communism, and religion. The latter has come back into Vattimo’s life in a significant way since the late 1980s and 1990s. His faith is difficult to categorise, being a non-dogmatic and highly idiosyncratic form of the Catholicism with which he was brought up. Vattimo ‘thanks God’ that he is an atheist, says that he ‘believes that he believes’, and has closely related his faith to his philosophy of weak thought. He has also returned to the Communism of his younger years, albeit in a manner similarly ‘weakened’. Aside from his theoretical output, Vattimo has been active politically and was elected as a Member of the European Parliament in 1999. Since retiring from his university post in Turin in 2008 he has continued to publish prolifically.

2. The End of History

Vattimo contends that the Western postmodern experience is that of the end of history. By this he means that the way we can view the past can no longer be as if it had a unilinear character. By ‘unilinear character’, Vattimo means a way of writing and viewing history that sees it as a single train of events, often working towards a goal and privileging one interpretation of the past. Vattimo argues that there is no longer a coherent narrative which is accepted in the West. The typical modern narrative was one of progress, whether this concerned scientific and technological innovation, increasing freedom, or even a Marxist interpretation of history. For this narrative to be coherent it must view the past in terms of cause and effect. It must see that which has happened before as determining the present, and therefore determining the future. According to Vattimo, history loses its unilinear character in three principal ways: theoretically, demographically, and through the rise of the society of generalised communication. For the first way, Vattimo turns to Walter Benjamin’s essay ‘Theses on the Philosophy of History’ (1938), in which Benjamin argues that unilinear history is a product of class conflict. The powerful — kings, emperors, nobles — make history in a manner denied to the poor. Vattimo acknowledges that Benjamin was speaking from a nascent tradition, already begun by Marx and Nietzsche, of seeing history as constructed and not impartial. Given the selective, power-laden nature of unilinear history, Vattimo surmises that it would be mistaken to think there is only one true history. Such a realisation has profound consequences for the idea of progress. If there is not one unique history but many histories, then there is no one clear goal throughout historical development. This implication applies equally to sacred eschatology as to secular Marxist hopes of world revolution and of the realisation of a classless society. In modern Europe, where the unilinear conception of history had flourished, demographic effects have acted to undermine this very notion. In particular, mass immigration has led to a greater prominence of alternative histories.

Furthermore, the rebellion of previously ruled peoples is a common theme in history. However, such rebellion becomes postmodern in the context of the age of mass communication and the after-effects of the two World Wars. Of course, a hallmark of the Reformation was the importance of the printed word. Nevertheless, it did not facilitate the en masse expression and preservation of alternative viewpoints as do radio, television and — mostly significantly — the internet. Hence for Vattimo the advent of the society of mass communication is the third major component of the ‘end of history’ and the start of postmodernity. Vattimo proposes:

(a) that the mass media play a decisive role in the birth of a postmodern society; (b) that they do not make this postmodern more ‘transparent’, but more complex, even chaotic; and finally (c) that it is in precisely this relative ‘chaos’ that our hopes for emancipation lie (Vattimo, 1992: 4).

The Transparent Society, in which Vattimo most clearly outlined his ideas on the end of history, was written shortly before the mass uptake of the internet by Western consumers. Nevertheless, Vattimo’s analysis of mass communication applies even more strongly in light of the effects of widespread internet use. While alternative television and radio stations gave voices to more groups, Twitter, Facebook, blogs and web forums go further by allowing anyone with minimal access to technology to express their worldview. Vattimo acknowledges that this view of the effect of the culture of mass communication is in contrast to the positions of Adorno, Horkheimer, and Orwell. These thinkers predicted that a homogenisation of society would be the result of such communications technology. Additionally, following his reading of Nietzsche, Vattimo only believes in the possibility of interpretations, rather than facts. Nevertheless, he takes great pains to show that his diagnosis of the situation of late modernity is a cogent interpretation. In particular, he claims that it makes the best possible sense of the interpretative plurality he sees around him.

For Vattimo, freedom of information and media multiplicity eliminate the possibility of conceiving of a single reality. This has epistemological consequences, since the plurality of histories and voices in the age of mass communication brings multiple rationalities and anthropologies to the fore. This undermines the possibility of constructing knowledge on certain foundations. Thus, the tendency to universalise and impose a single view of how the world is ordered on others is weakened. As a result, Vattimo sees in late modernity the realisation of Nietzsche’s prophecy of the world becoming a fable. That is, Vattimo considers it impossible to find objective reality among images received from the media: there is no way to step outside, or be an impartial spectator, of these images. The dissolution of the unilinear conception of history, and its implications for modern views on knowledge and reality, liberates differences by allowing local rationalities to come to the fore.

3. Hermeneutical Nihilism

a. The End of History, Nihilism, and Nietzsche’s ‘Death of God’

Vattimo argues that the implications for philosophy of the end of history, and therefore of modernity, are profound. The postmodern experience is fragmented, whereas modernity, with its coherent narrative, is unified. Thinking within a unified, coherent narrative is oriented towards a foundation or origin. It sees history as moving forward from this origin through a logical progression. By lacking this sense of progress, postmodern experience for Vattimo thus coincides with nihilism. In searching for an anchor for the self, the postmodern person finds no centre and no certain foundations. As such, Vattimo views the notion of nihilism as the expression of the dislocation humans feel in the postmodern age. Nihilism is encapsulated by a Nietzschean phrase that Vattimo uses in his work The End of Modernity: that man ‘rolls “from the centre toward X”…because, to use a Heideggerian expression for nihilism, “there is nothing left of Being as such’’’ (Vattimo, 1988a: 20). Not only is a foundation for knowledge undesirable in the fragmentation of experience characteristic of the postmodern age, but it is also impossible. Nietzsche’s term for this experience of nihilism is the ‘death of God’. This is not meant in a metaphysical sense, but rather as the loss of the highest values of which God is the highest of all. It is impossible to find a centre, a universally-accessible metaphysical foundation amidst all the images and messages delivered in a society of mass communication. As a result, nihilism entails that there is no clear point of origin, no accessible epistemic foundation, and no universally-shared sense of where we are going. Rather than seeing this in a negative light, Vattimo sees nihilism as our ‘sole opportunity’ for emancipation from the violence of metaphysics, as will be explicated below.

b. Heidegger: Being, Technology and Nihilism

While Heidegger is not conventionally seen as a nihilist, by reading him through Nietzsche, Vattimo is able to draw upon many of Heidegger’s ideas to enrich and deepen his own concept of nihilism. Heidegger thought that metaphysics was the history of the forgetting of Being, of how things are. Heidegger viewed philosophy from Plato to Nietzsche as a history of metaphysics. Since Plato, the question of Being had been pushed aside by metaphysics in favour of the question of truth, and of the relationship between subject and object. Yet the question of truth ignores the prior ontological question, for both subject and object exist. Metaphysics, through the use of reason, establishes foundations upon which truth is made objective and to which one ‘must give one’s assent or conform’ (Vattimo, 1999: 43).  Heidegger undercuts this establishment of foundations through his notion of the human being as ‘Dasein’. The term ‘Dasein’ refers to the human being as that which always has a pre-ontological interpretation of the world. This itself is given by the contingencies of how one is ‘thrown’ into the world, such as where, when and in what kind of environment one is brought up. In Vattimo’s reading of Heidegger, the end of metaphysics entails the same consequence as the death of God: nihilism and the emancipation of different interpretations, the latter no longer held to account by rationalistic metaphysics.

In his reading of Heidegger, Vattimo sees metaphysics reaching its point of culmination in modern technology. Before looking at Vattimo’s specifically nihilistic reading of Heidegger on technology, it is necessary to outline Heidegger’s thoughts on the issue. In ‘The Question Concerning Technology’ and Identity and Difference, Heidegger states that the essence of technology is not something technological: it is not merely instrumental, but also a way of revealing. The idea of ‘revealing’ comes from Heidegger’s phenomenological rejection of Kant divorcing how things appear to us from how they really are; Heidegger thought they are connected, and the appearance of something in our consciousness is how it is revealed to us, how it is brought into unconcealment. Every unconcealment also conceals, however, as our knowledge of beings is always fragmentary; there is always more to the essence of a thing than is revealed to us. Technology’s role in unconcealment for Heidegger is evident in the interest he pays to the ancient Greek etymology of techné, which emphasises technology’s role in ‘opening up’ and ‘revealing’. Techné is a form of poeisis, a Greek term for a poetic revealing that is a bringing-forth from unconcealment, whether an artisan brings-forth a chalice which was previously a potential chalice, or whether blossom brings itself into bloom. Primitive technology allowed nature to reveal itself ‘poetically’, such as a farmer watching crops grow and harvesting them or a windmill converting the energy generated by the wind when it blew. Industrial technology, on the other hand, ‘challenges’ nature by placing an unreasonable demand on it, forcing it to produce what is required of it by humans. For example, with man-made hydroelectricity dams the mode of revealing is a ‘challenging forth’, the way in which the river reveals itself is no longer the same. Rather than the Rhine appearing poetically as water flowing as a feature of a larger landscape, modern technology has made it become an energy resource. Equally, tourism cannot see the Rhine as an object of nature, but rather merely as a source of income. All nature is challenged in this way. Humans are also challenged, for they are reduced to the level of objects used for production. For example, human resources departments can be viewed as regarding humans as resources for production. A Humans waiting to go to work is, in this industrial society, like an aeroplane on a runway, having little value being brought-forth themselves, but only for something else; essentially both are ‘standing reserve’, valuable only when employed and at the mercy of a system which uses and manipulates them as and when required. The term for this type of revealing which is a challenging on a global scale is Ge-Stell (enframing). Ge-Stell is the culmination of metaphysics because it involves the total planning of everything in perfectly ordered relationships of cause and effect, all capable of unlimited manipulation.

Heidegger had a negative view of technology because of its nihilistic conclusion as the culmination of metaphysics. While Vattimo agrees with Heidegger’s critique of technology, he also sees liberating opportunities provided by it. These arise principally through drawing upon Heidegger’s later work: the notion of ‘the first flashing up of Ereignis’ (Vattimo, 1988a: 26), where Vattimo references Heidegger’s Identity and Difference. In Vattimo’s reading of this quotation, time spent considering Ge-Stell leads to an understanding of the event-like nature of Being through the Ereignis, the event of transpropriation. Heidegger’s later work is less interested in Dasein as the home or determining site of Being. Rather, Being is a horizon in which things appear, ‘the aperture within which alone man and the world, subject and object, can enter into relationship’ (Vattimo, 2004: 6). For the later Heidegger, Being is a series of irruptions, or ‘events’. There is a Selbst (same) which ‘sends’, or ‘destines’ (Geschick) these events, although it is wrong to think of the Selbst as a being, for this would be to repeat metaphysics. Demonstrating the influence of both Heidegger and Gadamer, Vattimo thinks that Being is nothing other than language. Therefore, the way Being appears to us is in a series of historical announcements (events) that colour our interpretation of the traces of Being from previous epochs (the sendings of Being). The traces of Being are transmitted through linguistic traditions into which we - as Dasein - are always already thrown.

Vattimo extends Heidegger’s understanding of technology to take into account contemporary communications technology. In the play of images and messages attained through media such as television, radio and the internet, the difference between subject and object dissolves. For instance, one may doubt that someone’s online profile is ‘real’. Moreover, how could one ever verify its claim to representing reality? In the Ereignis which results from Ge-Stell, metaphysical designations such as ‘subject’ and ‘object’ disappear as everything is challenged-forth. In the Enlightenment era, the rational Cartesian ‘thinking thing’ is not only the subject, but also the foundation of knowledge.  This anthropocentrism continued in different ways through the construction of unilinear narratives surrounding progress and science. As Ge-Stell challenges the distinction between humans and things as they are all reduced to causal determined standing-reserve, capable of manipulation, the Ereignis is the ‘event of appropriation’ that Vattimo considers a ‘trans-propriation’. In the Ereignis, humanity and Being (traditionally considered as that which grounds the rule of reason) lose their metaphysical properties of subject and object. As a result, Being is shown not as a foundation or a thing, but as an ‘exchange value’: as ‘language and... the tradition constituted by the transmission and interpretation of messages’ (Vattimo, 1988a: 26).

c. Ontology, ‘Exchange Value’ as Language, and Verwindung as Resignation

Before discussing exactly how language and tradition function within Vattimo’s philosophy, it is worth examining why he concerns himself with ontology at all. Some philosophers take the end of metaphysics to constitute a total departure from ontology, for they feel it is too closely associated with metaphysical foundationalism. Vattimo’s problem with this view is that a non-ontological approach to knowledge once again locates the origin of knowledge in beings, and in a manner that pertains to their own realms. Yet beings will plan and organise their realms such that an authority akin to the one previously associated with metaphysical Being is postulated of beings. This could lead to a relativism in which local epistemologies or groups are incapable of external criticism. Moreover, relativism may itself take on the appearance of a metaphysical principle.

Rather than approaching the end of metaphysics from a relativistic standpoint or retreating into a local epistemology, Vattimo looks at the postmodern experience through a nihilistic ontology. The postmodern experience is fragmented, since the ‘death of God’ means that there is an irreducible plurality of perspectives on the world. This fragmentation is exacerbated by the society of mass communication. Nevertheless, for Vattimo there are traces of traditions by which we can - and must - orient ourselves. It is in this sense that Vattimo contends that Being is reduced to ‘exchange value’. Our experience of existence is absorbed into the language we use. This language is taken from traces of traditions from past epochs. What Vattimo considers to be potentially liberating - our ‘sole opportunity’ and ‘nihilistic vocation’ - is how we approach, consider, and re-use the traces of Being from past traditions. This process involves the Heideggerian concept Verwindung.

Verwindung has multiple meanings for Vattimo, such as being resigned to tradition, yet also distorting or ‘twisting’ it and as a result getting better from it as a form of ‘convalescence’ from the ‘metaphysical malady’ (Vattimo, 2006: 151); metaphysics cannot be overcome by standing it ‘on its head’ (Vattimo, 2006: 151), for this would be to lay another foundation. Rather, Vattimo thinks that metaphysics can only be overcome by a long convalescence. To this end, Vattimo contrasts Verwindung with an Überwindung (overcoming) of modernity or an Aufhebung (dialectical overcoming in the Hegelian sense). If one were to overcome modernity, to leave metaphysics behind altogether, it would be to create a new foundation; whether locally, in the relativist sense described above, or as a new global epistemological foundation, one would be repeating the metaphysical tendency to create foundations. Moreover, in modernity Being was reduced to the value of the new. After the ‘death of God’, the geschick (the epoch of history of Being) in which we are living is one of dislocation where the narrative of progress has been demythologised.

If metaphysics is not to be overcome, but ‘twisted’, what does this involve and how does it happen? Lexically, Verwindung

is a convalescence (in the sense of ‘ein Krankheit verwinden’: to heal, to be cured of an illness) and a distorting (although this is a rather marginal meaning linked to ‘winden’, meaning ‘to twist’, and to the sense of a deviant alteration which the prefix ‘ver—‘ also possesses). The notion of ‘convalescence’ is linked to another meaning as well, that of ‘resignation’…Besides these meanings of the term, there is that of ‘distortion’ to consider as well (Vattimo, 1988a: 172-173).

This notion of Verwindung is related to Vattimo’s view of nihilism as our sole opportunity. He follows Nietzsche in referring to an ‘accomplished nihilism’, one which aims at creating one’s own values after the highest values have been dissolved. The opportunity of accomplished nihilism is limited by language, and this is where Verwindung comes into play:

Tradition is the transmitting of linguistic messages that constitute the horizon within which Dasein is thrown as an historically determined project: and tradition derives its importance from the fact that Being, as a horizon of disclosure in which things appear, can arise only as a trace of past words (Vattimo, 1988a: 120).

The exchange value of Being is like that of a common currency in the community. Another phrase Vattimo uses to show the inescapable influence of the metaphysical tradition is ‘the ontology of decline’: that we are living in ‘the Occident’ which is ‘the land of sunset (and hence, of Being)’. This nostalgia is a form of resignation, since one cannot escape metaphysics without creating a new foundation. Yet in doing so, one would succumb to the sort of authoritarianism one wishes to escape.

d. ‘Weak Thought,’ Hermeneutics and Verwindung as Convalescence-Alteration

In the postmodern experience, Dasein is thrown into an existence in which experience is fragmented. Furthermore, in this existence thought is limited by the common currency of Being as a collection of linguistic traces mediated by tradition. One cannot overcome metaphysics as a history of Being without falling into authoritarianism. However, in recognising the flaws of authoritarianism, one tacitly realises nihilism as the sole opportunity to find liberation. Such liberation occurs through weakening the traces of the tradition into which one is thrown. Nostalgic resignation, according to Vattimo, is not mere acceptance. The Being of Dasein is interpretative, and therefore the reception of traces of tradition is active, rather than passive. This is the active nihilism of Nietzsche’s ‘philosophy of the morning’. In Vattimo’s work, it is what came to be known in the early 1980s as the philosophical style of ‘weak thought’. Through Andenken and Sorge (care) one recollects the traces of Being handed down though the linguistic tradition. In receiving these traces, however, one interprets them in accordance with the sending of Being - the horizon - into which one is thrown. Nostalgia is also a recovery in that it involves a rewriting of the tradition. The sending of Being is an event rather than an unchanging essence, as it would be on a Platonic conception of Being.

If Being is the experience of existence, and Being is linguistic, then the issue of interpretation will come into play when expressing one’s existence. During the event of the sending of Being, one cannot conceive of traces of Being as simply true when recollecting them, that they are not ‘facts’ to be remembered. Therefore, although Vattimo sees Verwindung as a resignation to Being, it is an ironic remembrance rather than a total acceptance of it. Through recollecting and twisting traces of Being in light of the event of the sending of Being, one weakens strong truth claims. As a result, one is ‘healed’ from what Vattimo considers to be the violence of metaphysics. This ‘convalescent’ aspect of Verwindung occurs through the hermeneutical event of the act of interpretation. Determined in this manner, Vattimo’s philosophy of ‘weak thought’ involves a withdrawal from metaphysics by avoiding new foundations or complete assent to any position.

4. Return to Religion

a. Reasons behind Vattimo’s Return to Religion

On the face of it, Vattimo’s philosophy does not appear to be integrally connected to religion. Nevertheless, a significant proportion of Vattimo’s writings in the last twenty years have been devoted to religion and religious themes. Vattimo’s return to writing on religion was gradual, comprising only brief mentions in his works in the late 1980s, but appearing prominently in the 1990s. While personal factors, including old age and the death of loved ones, brought him back to his faith, Vattimo is first and foremost a theorist. During that period, the profile of religion in society was growing through the Iranian Revolution and the role of Pope John Paul II in the breakdown of Communism. Vattimo developed his ideas on religion as an extension of his philosophies of hermeneutical nihilism, ‘weak thought’, and the relation of metaphysics to ontology. This largely entailed a reading of Heidegger through which the gradual weakening of metaphysics, rather than its return, is anticipated. Nevertheless, metaphysics cannot simply be overcome; it must be worked through in the forms of life we have inherited and are developing. The forms of life and traditions we inherit are the limits of our thought and language. Being is disclosed within language, so it is disclosed within cultural horizons. Hermeneutical nihilism leaves room for faith by dissolving the authoritarianism of reason.

Vattimo feels compelled to ascertain the implications of hermeneutical nihilism and ‘weak thought’ for Christianity. He sees Christianity as a set of beliefs and practices synonymous with Europe, and an inalienable facet in the formation of his character and personal life. Vattimo goes beyond merely applying his idea of ‘weak thought’ to Christianity. He twists Christianity in accordance with Verwindung, yet views the message of Christianity as a stimulus. This stimulus explains the sending of Being in late modernity as an irreducible plurality of interpretations. In part, this conception is the result of Vattimo’s acquaintance with the work of René Girard, whose notion of the ‘natural sacred’ he sees as a transcription of Heidegger’s attitude to Being.

b. The Philosophical Importance of the Christian Message in Vattimo’s Thought

René Girard’s theological anthropology has focussed on the importance of Christ’s death and resurrection in revealing the mechanisms that underpin society. On Girard’s view, natural religions are founded upon the need to create victims to keep order in society. The mimetic drive in humans to desire what the other has escalates until violence threatens to consume society. A sacrificial scapegoat is killed to prevent the society’s destruction. Over time this becomes ever more ritualised and assumes a sacral and divine character. Girard sees the Old and New Testaments as intended to reveal this victim-based mechanism. Jesus’ purpose was not, as Christian theology proposes, to be the perfect sacrifice for his father. Instead, Girard thinks that Jesus was put on the cross due to his revelation of this mechanism. Vattimo, who likewise considers the sacred to involve violence, saw the potential for adaptation of Girard’s notion of the natural sacred. Unlike Girard, Vattimo does not see Jesus as revealing an anthropological truth (the victim-based mechanism). Vattimo instead sees Jesus as the instigator of the desacralising weakening that has come to fruition in modernity. This weakening occurs through the exposition of the tendency of religions to be authoritarian and violent, particularly in demanding sacrifice.

Vattimo sees Heidegger’s philosophy ‘as an active…revelation of the same victimary mechanism that Girard makes us discover in the Judeo-Christian Scripture’ (Vattimo, 2010: 80). Vattimo thinks that Heidegger’s philosophy is a transcription of the Judeo-Christian revelation, especially as the latter is interpreted by Girard. For Girard, this is ‘the basic victimary structure of all human culture; for Heidegger, it exposes the “secret” of metaphysics, which is the forgetting of Being and the identification of it with beings, objectivity etc.’ (Vattimo, 2010: 81). The meaning of history for both Girard and Heidegger, as Vattimo reads them, is emancipation from violence. Vattimo sees in Girard a link between the ‘violent’ God of metaphysics and the violence he sees in metaphysics, broadly following Heidegger’s understanding of it. The notion of God referred to here is the onto-theological, maximising concept of God containing the attributes of omnipotence, omniscience, and judgment. In his introduction to Vattimo and Girard’s Christianity, Truth and Weakening Faith, Pierpaolo Antonello makes clear the link between Girard and Vattimo:

The rupture of the sacrificial circle, accomplished by the Judeo-Christian revelation (in Girard’s terms) or the kenosis of God through the incarnation (in Vattimo’s), launched a historical development that culminates in the present age (Antonello, 2010: 9).

For Girard, the culmination is the present age in which humans have a decision to continue with mimetic rivalry and the sacrifice of scapegoats even when it has become fully exposed. The exposition has taken place at an apocalyptic level, that of the brink of a global nuclear holocaust, and through Jesus’ call for charity. For Vattimo, the culmination is the realisation of the process of secularisation in hermeneutics.

Reading Girard helped Vattimo to reappraise Christianity, and to see faith in Christ as faith in the weakening of strong structures. Vattimo began to connect Girard’s theological anthropology to Heidegger’s attitude to Being. The violence of the natural sacred is akin, in Vattimo’s eyes, to the violence of metaphysics. Girard also impressed on Vattimo the importance of Christ for explaining the current situation of hermeneutical nihilism. While Girard focussed on his notions of mimesis and the natural sacred, Vattimo translated these ideas into terms borrowed from the language of theology. Vattimo draws upon the ‘incarnation’ in a variety of ways, principally through the closely related notion of kenosis, a term often used in the Bible to refer to the ‘self-emptying’ of Christ (Philippians 2:7). In line with this association, Vattimo refers to a variety of Biblical passages in support of his understanding of kenosis. He quotes Hebrews 1:1-2 in Beyond Interpretation, one of the earlier extended pieces of writing in his return to religion. In that text Vattimo used kenosis to refer to the archetype of hermeneutic plurality in the West, comparing and contrasting it with other, less suitable (that is, in Vattimo’s view, metaphysical) candidates such as Aristotle’s claim that ‘Being is said in many ways’. For Vattimo, Aristotle’s contention remains a metaphysical statement, and hence is less suitable than Paul’s ‘prophetic’ alternative from Hebrews. The latter, Vattimo thinks, is a statement of weakening and of the message revealed in the incarnation of the Son of God. This message referred back to the prophets in the Old Testament, but also pointed forward to the Spirit speaking in many tongues at and after Pentecost (Acts 2). Vattimo uses this prophetic understanding of kenosis to challenge the idea of Wilhelm Dilthey’s that hermeneutics is a ‘general philosophy’ which grew out of the move away from metaphysical dogmatism. Instead, Vattimo uses kenosis to ground hermeneutics more fundamentally as a longstanding, archetypal tradition of the West. For Vattimo, ‘kenosis’ and ‘incarnation’ also reconfigure the relationship of the late-modern person to dogmatic thought, without overcoming it completely; it is a Verwindung rather than an Überwindung.

In other writings where Vattimo renews his focus on religion, Vattimo uses kenosis to refer to a process he calls ‘secularisation’. Through it, a message of weakening is passed down and weakens strong structures, including both the essence and the fulfilment of the Christian message. Vattimo invokes the notion of secularisation in Beyond Interpretation and in earlier writings, but without the precision he gives to the concept in Belief and After Christianity. In these later works, kenosis is the abasement of God. This can be understood as Him emptying himself of power and of otherness (Philippians 2:7), or as Christ calling humans to be friends rather than servants (John 15:15). Again utilising theological terms, Vattimo regards ‘salvation’ as reinterpreting Jesus’ words, and that we now feel free to reinterpret his words is evidence of salvation manifesting through history; the inauguration of the process of secularisation as weakening that occurred with kenosis has dissolved the strong structures (metaphysical, political, religious) that had restricted the possibilities of scriptural interpretation. Further weakening (for it is a process that never ends), Vattimo believes, occurs by weakening strong structures, living charitably and being open to others.

Vattimo draws upon the ideas of 12th century theologian Joachim of Fiore in this regard. Joachim saw history as divided into stages corresponding to the Trinity and the canon. The stage of the ‘Father’ pertained to the Old Testament, and this was about discipline. The stage of the ‘Son’ corresponded to the New Testament, and this was about the rise of the Church. Finally, the stage of the Spirit would eventually be a spiritual reading of scripture (one that rejects literalism and claims to objectivity) and greater interpretative freedom. Although Vattimo rejects literal prophecy as archaic, he is interested in a spiritual reading of scripture and doctrine. He sees the hermeneutics of the late-modern period as having a relationship to scripture and doctrine similar to the one Jesus has to the Old Testament: ‘you heard it was said…but I tell you…’ (Antitheses, Matthew 5). Indeed, Vattimo sees the hermeneutical nihilism of the postmodern era as the result of secularisation. That is, as the result of the kenosis of God that gradually liberates humanity from the myth of objectivity. On this issue, Vattimo relies heavily on the link between Jesus in Girard’s writing and the weakening of Being in Heidegger’s thought.

5. Ethics

Vattimo sees his philosophy of hermeneutical nihilism as having important ethical ramifications. As Vattimo claims that there are no facts, only interpretations, he opposes moral realism and any claim to objectivity in morals. Instead, Vattimo argues for an ‘ethics of finiteness’ which can be best summarised in the following passage from his recent work, A Farewell to Truth

[An ethic of finiteness should be] understood neither as the compulsion to leap into the void (much twentieth-century religious thought argues this line: acknowledgement of finiteness prepares the leap into faith, hence only a God can save us) nor as the definitive assumption of the alternatives concretely presented by the situation. An ethic of finiteness is one that strives to keep faith with the discovery of the always insuperable finite situatedness of one’s own provenance, while not forgetting the pluralistic implications of this discovery (Vattimo, 2011: 96).

Thus, in the face of nihilism, one should seek safety in the Other as expressed in the philosophies of Levinas or Derrida. On Vattimo’s view, these philosophers conceive of secularisation ‘as the fall in which God’s transcendence as the wholly other can be revealed through dialectical reversal’ (Vattimo, 2002: 37). Vattimo instead contends that one should acknowledge one’s situatedness, that of being a thrown project (we are born in a specific time, place, and with a particular background). The effect of this realisation should guard against strong thought. As he concedes in recent works, strong thought has in fact re-emerged in the late 20th and early 21st centuries. Vattimo’s ethics are therefore not normative in the conventional sense, but focus instead on encouraging the recognition of both one’s situatedness and the provisionality of one’s worldview.  Ethically, one should take a step backwards from one’s immediate situation. Although one’s cultural horizon constitutes the limit of thought, this does not entail outright moral relativism. One should be able to refrain from following the ethnic, cultural, religious or political principles local to one’s identity, since a lack of objective first principles does not warrant an immediate retreat into local rationalities. What is required is a disposition in accordance with the event of Being of the late modern, an the ability to step back from one’s immediate situation in order to take other people and their beliefs, values, and traditions into account.

In addition to stepping back from one’s immediate situation, the other main element of Vattimo’s ethics is the weakening of strong structures. Operating here is the influence of the traditionally Christian virtue of caritas (‘charity’), although Vattimo interprets this concept though his theory of ‘weak thought’. Vattimo sees caritas as the force driving secularisation, the application of the message of the kenosis of God through the interpretative act. Kenosis itself is an act of God showing his love for his creatures by emptying himself of his power and authority, and by calling us to be friends rather than servants. Indeed, it is possible to see caritas and kenosis as identical; kenosis is the message of the weakening of God, and caritas is the message of weakening as a formal principle. Imitating God is listening to the message of kenosis, of his weakening, and following it as if following a formal principle. In Vattimo’s case, the principle is of reducing violence by dissolving strong structures by interpreting and questioning them. As to whether caritas is itself metaphysical, Vattimo states that it ‘is not really ultimate and does not possess the peremptoriness of the metaphysical principle, which cannot be transcended’ (Vattimo, 1999: 64). Lacking the quality of being ‘ultimate’ is due paradoxically to caritas itself, since it is a principle of weakening. Its status as the kernel of revelation is guaranteed through Vattimo’s reading of kenosis as the heart of the New Testament, and his understanding of ‘love’ as God’s love shown through the message of his weakening.

For Vattimo caritas is the limit of secularisation. It is that which cannot be secularised and is the standard by which beliefs and practices should be judged when entering the secular public space. For instance, wearing the cross is not, Vattimo judges, offensive any longer because it has been secularised and is part of the cultural furniture of the West. However, the mindset involved in wearing the chador does not exhibit caritas as it is an example of strong thought. Those who wear or endorse the wearing of Islamic dress have not ‘read the signs of the times’, since the wearing of the chador is ‘an affirmation of a strong identity’ (Vattimo, 2002: 101). This mindset does not recognise the provisional nature and situatedness of its own provenance, nor does it accept the plurality of other views in the secular space of modern Europe. Therefore, Vattimo argues, it should not be legally permitted to express itself through such dress codes. Hence caritas prevents one from retreating into and cementing local identities in the absence of objective reality and objective values. However, Vattimo does not explore the possibility that the chador could be worn out of choice in a ‘weak’ sense.

Caritas rules out both specific normative positions and broader meta-ethical approaches. Concerning the latter, Vattimo is against anything that flouts ‘Hume’s law’ that one cannot derive an ‘ought’ from an ‘is’. The claim ‘torture is wrong’ can lead to ‘one should not torture’ only with the bridging statements ‘torture causes pain’ and ‘pain is wrong’. However, one must then explain why pain is wrong. Vattimo may well agree that one should minimise pain, but he would not do so on naturalistic grounds. This is because he does not believe that one can derive normative ethical prescriptions from rational observance of nature or eternal forms. Such a move would always entail that some people — such as Plato’s ‘philosopher kings’ — will claim authoritative knowledge of the link between nature and normativity. Vattimo justifies his approach in two ways. Firstly, he critiques the metaphysical nature of naturalistic meta-ethics. Secondly, he claims that the abuse of naturalistic ethics by elites is manifest in the position of the Catholic Church on sexual ethics (prohibition of homosexual acts and the use of artificial contraception) and medical or bio-ethics (prohibitions against euthanasia).

6. Political Philosophy

Vattimo was a Marxist during his youth. He eventually moved away from Marxism when he realised that some of his students’ metaphysical commitments were leading them to violent acts. This pushed him to develop his hermeneutics in the direction of weakening metaphysical strong structures of all forms, including Marxist commitments. Drawing upon the implications of hermeneutics for politics, Vattimo warns against specialists, technocrats, and any kind of leadership that presumes exclusive knowledge of the truth by which to lead a country. Likening these kinds of individuals to Plato’s philosopher kings, Vattimo sees any such form of governance as falling prey to the myth about objective truth. Rather, Vattimo argues, politics should be bounded by the cultural horizon of its time and place. In this sense, Vattimo consciously limits politics and politicians in the way Thomas Kuhn limited the claims of scientists with his ‘paradigm’ concept. Eternal forms and objective truths are replaced with provisional judgements. These are based on forms of life limited and constituted by cultural horizons and re-interpreted linguistic traditions.

Plato’s philosopher kings — the specialists, experts, and technocrats — can lead to totalitarianism, which Vattimo is keen to avoid. If the laws that run society were objective, Vattimo thinks that democracy would be an irrational choice. However, a ‘weak ontology’ or a ‘philosophy of weakening’ can provide reasons for preferring liberal democracy over totalitarianism. Vattimo relates totalitarian government to Heidegger’s ‘Ge-Stell’, and claims that within the Ge-Stell there is the first flashing-up of Ereignis. This aperture enables one to see that truth is not found in ‘presence’. Rather, it is based in historical events and the consensus formed within cultural horizons. Individuals can liberate themselves from facilitating government agendas through this realisation. Governments themselves can change through acknowledging the provisional and culturally-bound nature of thought. Although Vattimo aimed to move away from revolutionary violence, his justification of democracy over totalitarianism is particularly timely given the Arab Spring.

In recent years Vattimo has returned to a weakened Marxism, a form of Communism deeply informed by his philosophy of ‘weak thought’. Attempting to distance himself from the kind of Communism put into practice in the Soviet era, Vattimo claims that the problem with the traditional understanding of Marx is that his ideas have been framed metaphysically. Vattimo therefore looks to create a post-metaphysical Marxism. As with Catholicism, Vattimo realises one cannot overcome Marxism, but that it should be twisted. ‘Hermeneutic Communism’ is presented by Vattimo and his collaborator Santiago Zabala as an alternative to forms of liberal capitalism that aim to keep the status quo in favour of those benefitting from the system. Equally, they see it as an alternative to forms of Marxism that involve unilinear historicism.

7. References and Further Reading

The list of works by Vattimo is a non-exhaustive list, covering his major works in translation. Literature on Vattimo is growing. For works about Vattimo, the Benso and Zabala edited volumes are good places to start, covering a range of his work.

a. Works by Vattimo

  • The End of Modernity: Nihilism and Hermeneutics in Postmodern Culture. Trans. J. R. Snyder. Baltimore: John Hopkins University Press 1988a.
  • “Metaphysics, Violence, Secularisation.” Trans. B. Spackman. In Recoding Metaphysics: The New Italian Philosophy. Edited by G. Borradori. Evanston: Northwestern University Press 1988b, 45-61.
  • “Toward an Ontology of Decline Recoding Metaphysics.” Trans. B. Spackman. In Recoding Metaphysics: The New Italian Philosophy. Edited by G. Borradori. Evanston: Northwestern University Press 1988c.
  • The Transparent Society. Trans. D. Webb. Cambridge: Polity Press 1992.
  • The Adventure of Difference: Philosophy after Nietzsche and Heidegger. Trans. C. P. Blamires and T. Harrison. Cambridge: Polity Press 1993.
  • Beyond Interpretation: The Meaning of Hermeneutics for Philosophy. Trans. D. Webb. Cambridge: Polity Press, 1997.
  • With J. Derrida. Religion. Stanford: Stanford University Press 1998.
  • Belief. Trans. L. D’Isanto and D. Webb. Cambridge: Polity Press 1999.
  • Nietzsche: An Introduction. Trans. N. Martin. Stanford: Stanford University Press 2002.
  • After Christianity. Trans. L. D’Isanto. New York: Columbia University Press 2002.
  • Nihilism and Emancipation: Ethics, Politics, and Law. Foreword by Richard Rorty. Edited by Santiago Zabala and translated by William McCuaig. New York: Columbia University Press 2004.
  • With R. Rorty. The Future of Religion. Edited by Santiago Zabala. New York: Columbia University Press 2005.
  • Dialogue with Nietzsche. Trans. William McCuaig. New York: Columbia University Press 2006.
  • With John D. Caputo. After the Death of God. Edited by Jeffrey W. Robbins. New York: Columbia University Press 2007.
  • With Piergiorgio Paterlini. Not Being God: A Collaborative Autobiography. Trans. William McCuaig. New York: Columbia University Press 2009.
  • With René Girard. Christianity, Truth and Weakening Faith: A Dialogue. Edited by Pierpaolo Antonello. New York: Columbia University Press 2010.
  • The Responsibility of the Philosopher. Edited by Franca D’Agostini and translated by William McCuaig. New York: Columbia University Press 2010.
  • A Farewell to Truth. Trans. William McCuaig, with a foreword by Robert T. Valgenti. New York: Columbia University Press 2011.
  • With Santiago Zabala. Hermeneutic Communism: From Heidegger to Marx. New York and Chichester, West Sussex: Columbia University Press, 2011.

b. Works on Vattimo

  • Benso, S., Schroeder, B, eds. Between Nihilism and Politics: The Hermeneutics of Gianni Vattimo. New York: SUNY 2010.
  • Borradori, G. ““Weak Thought” and Postmodernism: The Italian Departure from Deconstruction.” Social Text 18 (Winter, 1987-1988), 39-49.
  • Depoortere, F. Christ in Postmodern Philosophy. London: T&T Clark 2008.
  • Guarino, T. Vattimo and Theology. New York: Continuum 2009.
  • Pireddu, Nicoletta. “Gianni Vattimo.” In Postmodernism, edited by Johannes Willem Bertene and Joseph P. Natoli. Boston: Blackwell 2002, 302-9.
  • Woodward, Ashley. “Nihilism and the Postmodern in Vattimo’s Nietzsche.” Minerva 6 (2002), 51-67.
  • Zabala, Santiago, ed. Weakening Philosophy: Essays in Honour of Gianni Vattimo. Montreal and Kingston, London, Ithaca: McGill-Queen’s University Press 2007.

c. Other Works Cited

  • Giorgio Colli and Mazzino Montinari, eds. Nietzsche: Werke. Kritische Gesamtausgabe. Berlin and New York, 1967ff.


Author Information

Matthew Edward Harris
Staffordshire University
United Kingdom

Musonius Rufus (c. 30–62 C.E.)

Gaius Musonius Rufus was one of the four great Stoic philosophers of the Roman empire, along with Seneca, Epictetus, and Marcus Aurelius. Renowned as a great Stoic teacher, Musonius conceived of philosophy as nothing but the practice of noble behavior. He advocated a commitment to live for virtue, not pleasure, since virtue saves us from the mistakes that ruin life. Though philosophy is more difficult to learn than other subjects, it is more important because it corrects the errors in thinking that lead to errors in acting. He also called for austere personal habits, including the simplest vegetarian diet, and minimal, inexpensive garments and footwear, in order to achieve a good, sturdy life in accord with the principles of Stoicism. He believed that philosophy must be studied not to cultivate brilliance in arguments or an excessive cleverness, but to develop good character, a sound mind, and a tough, healthy body. Musonius condemned all luxuries and disapproved of sexual activity outside of marriage. He argued that women should receive the same education in philosophy as men, since the virtues are the same for both sexes. He praised the married life with lots of children. He affirmed Stoic orthodoxy in teaching that neither death, injury, insult, pain, poverty, nor exile is to be feared since none of them are evils.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Teachings
  3. Philosophy, Philosophers, and Virtue
  4. Food and Frugality
  5. Women and Equal Education
  6. Sex, Marriage, Family, and Old Age
  7. Impact
  8. References and Further Reading

1. Life

Gaius Musonius Rufus was born before 30 C.E. in Volsinii, an Etruscan city of Italy, as a Roman eques (knight), the class of aristocracy ranked second only to senators. He was a friend of Rubellius Plautus, whom emperor Nero saw as a threat. When Nero banished Rubellius around 60 C.E., Musonius accompanied him into exile in Asia Minor. After Rubellius died in 62 C.E. Musonius returned to Rome, where he taught and practiced Stoicism, which roused the suspicion of Nero. On discovery of the great conspiracy against Nero, led by Calpurnius Piso in 65 C.E., Nero banished Musonius to the arid, desolate island of Gyaros in the Aegean Sea. He returned to Rome under the reign of Galba in 68 C.E. and tried to advocate peace to the Flavian army approaching Rome. In 70 C.E. Musonius secured the conviction of the philosopher Publius Egnatius Celer, who had betrayed Barea Soranus, a friend of Rubellius Plautus. Musonius was exiled a second time, by Vespasian, but returned to Rome in the reign of Titus. Musonius was highly respected and had a considerable following during his life. He died before 101-2 C.E.

2. Teachings

Either Musonius wrote nothing himself, or what he did write is lost, because none of his own writings survive. His philosophical teachings survive as thirty-two apophthegms (pithy sayings) and twenty-one longer discourses, all apparently preserved by others and all in Greek, except for Aulus Gellius’ testimonia in Latin. For this reason, it is likely that he lectured in Greek. Musonius favored a direct and concise style of instruction. He taught that the teacher of philosophy should not present many arguments but rather should offer a few, clear, practical arguments oriented to his listener and couched in terms known to be persuasive to that listener.

3. Philosophy, Philosophers, and Virtue

Musonius believed that (Stoic) philosophy was the most useful thing. Philosophy persuades us, according to Stoic teaching, that neither life, nor wealth, nor pleasure is a good, and that neither death, nor poverty, nor pain is an evil; thus the latter are not to be feared. Virtue is the only good because it alone keeps us from making errors in living. Moreover, it is only the philosopher who seems to make a study of virtue. The person who claims to be studying philosophy must practice it more diligently than the person studying medicine or some other skill, because philosophy is more important, and more difficult to understand, than any other pursuit. This is because, unlike other skills, people who study philosophy have been corrupted in their souls with vices and thoughtless habits by learning things contrary to what they will learn in philosophy. But the philosopher does not study virtue just as theoretical knowledge. Rather, Musonius insists that practice is more important than theory, as practice more effectively leads us to action than theory. He held that though everyone is naturally disposed to live without error and has the capacity to be virtuous, someone who has not actually learned the skill of virtuous living cannot be expected to live without error any more than someone who is not a trained doctor, musician, scholar, helmsman, or athlete could be expected to practice those skills without error.

In one of his lectures Musonius recounts the advice he offered to a visiting Syrian king. A king must protect and help his subjects, so a king must know what is good or bad, helpful or harmful, useful or useless for people. But to diagnose these things is precisely the philosopher’s job. Since a king must also know what justice is and make just decisions, a king must study philosophy. A king must possess self-control, frugality, modesty, courage, wisdom, magnanimity, the ability to prevail in speech over others, the ability to endure pain, and must be free of error. Philosophy, Musonius argued, is the only art that provides all such virtues. To show his gratitude the king offered him anything he wanted, to which Musonius asked only that the king adhere to the principles set forth.

Musonius held that since a human being is made of body and soul, we should train both, but the latter demands greater attention. This dual method requires becoming accustomed to cold, heat, thirst, hunger, scarcity of food, a hard bed, abstaining from pleasures, and enduring pains. This method strengthens the body, inures it to suffering, and makes it fit for every task. He believed that the soul is similarly strengthened by developing courage through enduring hardships, and by making it self-controlled through abstaining from pleasures. Musonius insisted that exile, poverty, physical injury, and death are not evils and a philosopher must scorn all such things. A philosopher regards being beaten, jeered at, or spat upon as neither injurious nor shameful and so would never litigate against anyone for any such acts, according to Musonius. He argued that since we acquire all good things by pain, the person who refuses to endure pain all but condemns himself to not being worthy of anything good.

Musonius criticized cooks and chefs while defending farming as a suitable occupation for a philosopher and no obstacle to learning or teaching essential lessons.

4. Food and Frugality

Musonius’ extant teachings emphasize the importance of daily practices. For example, he emphasized that what one eats has significant consequences. He believed that mastering one’s appetites for food and drink is the basis for self-control, a vital virtue. He argued that the purpose of food is to nourish and strengthen the body and to sustain life, not to provide pleasure. Digesting our food gives us no pleasure, he reasoned, and the time spent digesting food far exceeds the time spent consuming it. It is digestion which nourishes the body, not consumption. Therefore, he concluded, the food we eat serves its purpose when we’re digesting it, not when we’re tasting it.

The proper diet, according to Musonius, was lacto-vegetarian. These foods are least expensive and most readily available: raw fruits in season, certain raw vegetables, milk, cheese, and honeycombs. Cooked grains and some cooked vegetables are also suitable for humans, whereas a meat-based diet is too crude for human beings and is more suitable for wild beasts. Those who eat relatively large amounts of meat seemed slow-witted to Musonius.

We are worse than brute animals when it comes to food, he thought, because we are obsessed with embellishing how our food is presented and fuss about what we eat and how we prepare it merely to amuse our palates. Moreover, too much rich food harms the body. For these reasons, Musonius thought that gastronomic pleasure is undoubtedly the most difficult pleasure to combat. He consequently rejected gourmet cuisine and delicacies as a dangerous habit. He judged gluttony and craving gourmet food to be most shameful and to show a lack of moderation. Indeed, Musonius was of the opinion that those who eat the least expensive food can work harder, are the least fatigued by working, become sick less often, tolerate cold, heat, and lack of sleep better, and are stronger, than those who eat expensive food. He concluded that responsible people favor what is easy to obtain over what is difficult, what involves no trouble over what does, and what is available over what isn’t. These preferences promote self-control and goodness.

Musonius advocated a similarly austere philosophy about clothes. The purpose of our clothes and footwear is strictly protection from the elements. So clothes and shoes should be modest and inexpensive, not attract the attention of the foolish. One should dress to strengthen and toughen the body, not to bundle up in many layers so as never to experience cold and heat and make the body soft and sensitive. Musonius recommended dressing to feel somewhat cold in the winter and avoiding shade in the summer. If possible, he advised, go shoeless.

The purpose of houses, he believed, was to protect us from the elements, to keep out cold, excessive heat, and the wind. Our dwelling should protect us and our food the way a cave would. Money should be spent both publicly and privately on people, not on elaborate buildings or fancy décor. Beds or tables of ivory, silver, or gold, hard-to-get textiles, cups of gold, silver, or marble—all such furnishings are entirely unnecessary and shamefully extravagant. Items that are expensive to acquire, hard to use, troublesome to clean, difficult to guard, or impractical, are inferior when compared with inexpensive, useful, and practical items made of cast iron, plain ceramic, wood, and the like. Thoughtless people covet expensive furnishings they wrongly believe are good and noble. He said he would rather be sick than live in luxury, because illness harms only the body, whereas living in luxury harms both the body and the soul. Luxury makes the body weak and soft and the soul undisciplined and cowardly. Musonius judged that luxurious living fosters unvarnished injustice and greed, so it must be completely avoided.

For the ancient Roman philosophers, following their Greek predecessors, the beard was the badge of a philosopher. Musonius said that a man should cut the hair on his scalp the way he prunes vines, by removing only what is useless and bothersome. The beard, on the other hand, should not be shaved, he insisted, because (1) nature provides it to protect a man’s face, and (2) the beard is the emblem of manhood, the human equivalent of the cock’s comb and the lion’s mane. Hair should never be trimmed to beautify or to please women or boys. Hair is no more trouble for men than feathers are for birds, Musonius said. Consequently, shaving or fastidiously trimming one’s beard were acts of emasculation.

5. Women and Equal Education

Musonius supported his belief that women ought to receive the same education in philosophy as men with the following arguments. First, the gods have given women the same power of reason as men. Reason considers whether an action is good or bad, honorable or shameful. Second, women have the same senses as men: sight, hearing, smell, and the rest. Third, the sexes share the same parts of the body: head, torso, arms, and legs. Fourth, women have an equal desire for virtue and a natural affinity for it. Women, no less than men, are by nature pleased by noble, just deeds and censure their opposites. Therefore, Musonius concluded, it is just as appropriate for women to study philosophy, and thereby to consider how to live honorably, as it is for men.

Moreover, he reasoned, a woman must be able to manage an estate, to account for things beneficial to it, and to supervise the household staff. A woman must also have self-control. She must be free from sexual improprieties and must exercise self-control over other pleasures. She must neither be a slave to desires, nor quarrelsome, nor extravagant, nor vain. A self-controlled woman, Musonius believed, controls her anger, is not overcome by grief, and is stronger than every emotion. But these are the character traits of a beautiful person, whether male or female.

Musonius argued that a woman who studies philosophy would be just, a blameless partner in life, a good and like-minded co-worker, a careful guardian of husband and children, and completely free from the love of gain and greed. She would regard it worse to do wrong than to be wronged, and worse to take more than one’s share than to suffer loss. No one, Musonius insisted, would be more just than she. Moreover, a philosophic woman would love her children more than her own life. She would not hesitate to fight to protect her children any more than a hen that fights with predators much larger than she is to protect her chicks.

He considered it appropriate for an educated woman to be more courageous than an uneducated woman and for a woman trained in philosophy to be more courageous than one untrained in philosophy. Musonius noted that the tribe of Amazons conquered many people with weapons, thus demonstrating that women are fully capable of courageously participating in armed conflict. He thought it appropriate for the philosophic woman not to submit to anything shameful out of fear of death or pain. Nor is it appropriate for her to bow down to anyone, whether well-born, powerful, wealthy, or even a tyrant. Musonius saw the philosophic woman as holding the same beliefs as the Stoic man: she thinks nobly, does not judge death to be an evil, nor life to be a good, nor shrinks from pain, nor pursues lack of pain above all else. Musonius thought it likely that this kind of woman would be self-motivated and persevering, would breast-feed her children, serve her husband with her own hands, and do without hesitation tasks which some regard as appropriate for slaves. Thus, he judged that a woman like this would be a great advantage for her husband, a source of honor for her kinfolk, and a good example for the women who know her.

Musonius believed that sons and daughters should receive the same education, since those who train horses and dogs train both the males and the females the same way. He rejected the view that there is one type of virtue for men and another for women. Women and men have the same virtues and so must receive the same education in philosophy.

When it comes to certain tasks, on the other hand, Musonius was less egalitarian. He believed that the nature of males is stronger and that of females is weaker, and so the most suitable tasks ought to be assigned to each nature accordingly. In general, men should be assigned the heavier tasks (e.g. gymnastics and being outdoors), women the lighter tasks (e.g. spinning yarn and being indoors). Sometimes, however, special circumstances—such as a health condition—would warrant men undertaking some of the lighter tasks which seem to be suited for women, and women in turn undertaking some of the harder ones which seem more suited for men. Thus, Musonius concludes that no chores have been exclusively reserved for either sex. Both boys and girls must receive the same education about what is good and what is bad, what is helpful and what is harmful. Shame towards everything base must be instilled in both sexes from infancy on. Musonius’ philosophy of education dictated that both males and females must be accustomed to endure toil, and neither to fear death nor to become dejected in the face of any misfortune.

6. Sex, Marriage, Family, and Old Age

Musonius’ opposition to luxurious living extended to his views about sex. He thought that men who live luxuriously desire a wide variety of sexual experiences, both legitimate and illegitimate, with both women and men. He remarked that sometimes licentious men pursue a series of male sex-partners. Sometimes they grow dissatisfied with available male sex-partners and choose to pursue those who are hard to get. Musonius condemned all such recreational sex acts. He insisted that only those sex acts aimed at procreation within marriage are right. He decried adultery as unlawful and illegitimate. He judged homosexual relationships as an outrage contrary to nature. He argued that anyone overcome by shameful pleasure is base in his lack of self-control, and so blamed the man (married or unmarried) who has sex with his own female slave as much as the woman (married or unmarried) who has sex with her male slave.

Musonius argued that there must be companionship and mutual care of husband and wife in marriage since its chief end is to live together and have children. Spouses should consider all things as common possessions and nothing as private, not even the body itself. But since procreation can result from sexual relations outside of marriage, childbirth cannot be the only motive for marriage. Musonius thought that when each spouse competes to surpass the other in giving complete care, the partnership is beautiful and admirable. But when a spouse considers only his or her own interests and neglects the other's needs and concerns, their union is destroyed and their marriage cannot help but go poorly. Such a couple either splits up or their relationship becomes worse than solitude.

Musonius advised those planning to marry not to worry about finding partners from noble or wealthy families or those with beautiful bodies. Neither wealth, nor beauty, nor noble birth promotes a sense of partnership or harmony, nor do they facilitate procreation. He judged bodies that are healthy, normal in form, and able to function on their own, and souls that are naturally disposed towards self-control, justice, and virtue, as most fit for marriage.

Since he held that marriage is obviously in accordance with nature, Musonius rejected the objection that being married gets in the way of studying philosophy. He cited Pythagoras, Socrates, and Crates as examples of married men who were fine philosophers. To think that each should look only to his own affairs is to think that a human being is no different from a wolf or any other wild beast whose nature is to live by force and greed. Wild animals spare nothing they can devour, they have no companions, they never work together, and they have no share in anything just, according to Musonius. He supposed that human nature is very much like that of bees, who are unable to live alone and die when isolated. Bees work and act together. Wicked people are unjust and savage and have no concern for a neighbor in trouble. Virtuous people are good, just, and kind, and show love for their fellow human beings and concern for their neighbors. Marriage is the way for a person to create a family to provide the well-being of the city. Therefore, Musonius judged that anyone who deprives people of marriage destroys family, city, and the entire human race. He reasoned that this is because humans would cease to exist if there were no procreation, and there would be no just and lawful procreation without marriage. He concluded that marriage is important and serious because great gods (Hera, Eros, Aphrodite) govern it.

Musonius opined that the bigger a family, the better. He thought that having many children is beneficial and profitable for cities while having few or none is harmful. Consequently, he praised the wise lawgivers who forbade women from agreeing to be childless and from preventing conception, who enacted punishment for women who induced miscarriages, who punished married couples who were childless, and who honored married couples with many children. He reasoned that just as the man with many friends is mightier than the man without friends, the father with many children is much mightier than the man who has few or none. Musonius was very impressed by the spectacle of a husband or wife with their many children crowded around them. He believed that no procession for the gods and no sacred ritual is as beautiful to behold, or as worthy of being witnessed, as a chorus of many children leading their parents through the city. Musonius scolded those who offered poverty as an excuse for not raising many children. He was outraged by the well-off or affluent refusing to raise children who are born later so that the earlier-born may be better off. Musonius believed that it was an unholy act to deprive the earlier-born of siblings to increase their inheritance. He thought it much better to have many siblings than to have many possessions. Possessions invite plots from neighbors. Possessions need protection. Siblings, he taught, are one’s greatest protectors. Musonius opined that the man who enjoys the blessing of many loyal brothers is most worthy of emulation and most beloved by the gods.

When asked whether one’s parents should be obeyed in all matters, Musonius answered as follows. If a father, who was neither a doctor nor knowledgeable about health and sickness, ordered his sick son to take something he believed would help, but which would in fact be useless, or even harmful, and the sick son, knowing this, did not comply with his father’s order, the son would not be acting disobediently. Similarly, if the father was ill and asked for wine or inappropriate food that would worsen his illness if consumed, and the son, knowing better, refused to give them to his ill father, the son would not be acting disobediently. Even less disobedient, Musonius argued, is the son who refuses to steal or embezzle money entrusted to him when his greedy father commands it. The lesson is that refusing to do what one ought not to do merits praise, not blame. The disobedient person disobeys orders that are right, honorable, and beneficial, and acts shamefully in doing so. But to refuse to obey a shameful, blameworthy command of a parent is just and blameless. The obedient person obeys only his parent’s good, appropriate advice, and obeys all of such advice. The law of Zeus orders us to be good, and being good is the same thing as being a philosopher, Musonius taught.

He argued that the best thing to have on hand during old age is living in accord with nature, the definitive goal of life according to the Stoics. Human nature, he thought, can be better understood by comparing it to the nature of other animals. Horses, dogs, and cows are all inferior to human beings. We do not consider a horse to reach its potential by merely eating, drinking, mating without restraint, and doing none of the things suitable for a horse. Nor do we regard a dog as reaching its potential if it merely indulges in all sorts of pleasures while doing none of the things for which dogs are thought to be good. Nor would any other animal reach its potential by being glutted with pleasures but failing to function in a manner appropriate to its species. Hence, no animal comes into existence for pleasure. The nature of each animal determines the virtue characteristic of it. Nothing lives in accord with nature except what demonstrates its virtue through the actions which it performs in accord with its own nature. Therefore, Musonius concluded, the nature of human beings is to live for virtue; we did not come into existence for the sake of pleasure. Those who live for virtue deserve praise, can rightly think well of themselves, and can be hopeful, courageous, cheerful, and joyful. The human being, Musonius taught, is the only creature on earth that is the image of the divine. Since we have the same virtues as the gods, he reasoned, we cannot imagine better virtues than intelligence, justice, courage, and self-control. Therefore, a god, since he has these virtues, is stronger than pleasure, greed, desire, envy, and jealousy. A god is magnanimous and both a benefactor to, and a lover of, human beings. Consequently, Musonius reasoned, inasmuch as a human being is a copy of a god, a human being must be considered to be like a god when he acts in accord with nature. The life of a good man is the best life, and death is its end. Musonius thought that wealth is no defense against old age because wealth lets people enjoy food, drink, sex, and other pleasures, but never supplies contentment to a wealthy person nor banishes his grief. Therefore, the good man lives without regret, and according to nature by accepting death fearlessly and boldly in his old age, living happily and honorably till the end.

7. Impact

Musonius seems to have acted as an advisor to his friends the Stoic martyrs Rubellius Plautus, Barea Soranus, and Thrasea. Musonius’ son-in-law Artemidorus was judged by Pliny to be the greatest of the philosophers of his day, and Pliny himself professed admiration for Musonius. Musonius’ pupils and followers include Fundanus, the eloquent philosopher Euphrates of Tyre, Timocrates of Heracleia, Athenodotus (the teacher of Marcus Cornelius Fronto), and the golden-tongued orator Dio of Prusa. His greatest student was Epictetus, who mentions him several times in The Discourses of Epictetus written by Epictetus’ student Arrian. Epictetus’ philosophy was deeply influenced by Musonius.

After his death Musonius was admired by philosophers and theologians alike. The Stoic Hierocles and the Christian apologist Clement of Alexandria were strongly influenced by Musonius. Roman emperor Julian the Apostate said that Musonius became famous because he endured his sufferings with courage and sustained with firmness the cruelty of tyrants. Dio of Prusa judged that Musonius enjoyed a reputation greater than any one man had attained for generations and that he was the man who, since the time of the ancients, had lived most nearly in conformity with reason. The Greek sophist Philostratus declared that Musonius was unsurpassed in philosophic ability.

8. References and Further Reading

  • King, Cynthia (trans.). Musonius Rufus. Lectures and Sayings. CreateSpace, 2011.
  • Lutz, Cora E. Musonius Rufus: “The Roman Socrates”. Yale Classical Studies 10: 3-147. New Haven: Yale Univ., 1947.
  • Nussbaum, Martha C. "The Incomplete Feminism of Musonius Rufus, Platonist, Stoic, and Roman," in The Sleep of Reason. Erotic Experience and Sexual Ethics in Ancient Greece and Rome. Ed. M. C. Nussbaum and J. Sihvola. Chicago: Univ. of Chicago, 2002.
  • van Geytenbeek, A. C. 1963. Musonius Rufus and Greek Diatribe. Rev. ed. trans. B. L. Hijmans, Jr. New York: Humanities Press, 1963.

Author Information

William O. Stephens
Creighton University
U. S. A.

Antoine Arnauld (1612—1694)

Antoine Arnauld was considered by his peers as one of the preeminent 17th century European intellectuals. Arnauld had been remembered primarily as a correspondent of René Descartes, Gottfried Leibniz and Nicolas Malebranche, and as a dogmatic and uncritical Cartesian who made few if any philosophical contributions. In fact, as much newer research suggests, Arnauld was not a dogmatic and uncritical Cartesian, and he made many philosophical contributions over and above facilitating the development of the philosophical systems of Descartes, Leibniz and Malebranche.

Arnauld’s primary endeavors were largely theological. Indeed, the 18th Century Enlightenment thinker Voltaire wrote of Arnauld that “there was no one with a more philosophical mind, but his philosophy was corrupted” because, among other things, he “plunged 60 years in miserable disputes” (Voltaire 1906, p. 728/Kremer 1990, p. xi). In other words, Voltaire claims that Arnauld wasted his time on religious disputes and theology instead of focusing on philosophy. While it is controversial (to say the least) whether Arnauld’s primary intellectual endeavors were in fact “miserable disputes,” it is certainly true that Arnauld devoted the majority of his efforts and writings to theological and religious questions. Arnauld is likely the figure most associated with a sect of Catholicism prominent in France in the 17th Century called Jansenism (other than Cornelius Jansen for whom Jansenism is so named, see section 1).

However, despite his focus on theological and religious issues, Arnauld was a major figure in the philosophical landscape of the latter half of the 17th century. Arnauld burst onto the philosophical scene in 1641, when he authored the Fourth Objections to Descartes’ Meditations on First Philosophy. After Descartes had finished the manuscript of the Meditations, he sent it to Marin Mersenne to acquire comments from leading intellectuals of the day in Paris, including Thomas Hobbes and Pierre Gassendi. In the eyes of many (Descartes included), Arnauld’s are the best set of objections.

In the 1660’s Arnauld co-authored several philosophical works with others, none more influential and important than the Port-Royal Logic, sometimes called the Art of Thinking. In this work, Arnauld and co-author Pierre Nicole, offer a sophisticated account of reasoning well, which for these thinkers encompassed not just what we might associate with logic proper today, but also issues concerning the nature of ideas, metaphysics, philosophical methodology and ontology. Arnauld corresponded with Gottfried Leibniz in the 1680’s concerning an outline of what would later become one of Leibniz's most influential works, the Discourse on Metaphysics. Arnauld also corresponded with Nicolas Malebranche in a very public controversy. In fact, this controversy has been called “one of the intellectual events of the [17th] century,” which covered, among other things the nature of ideas and the nature of God (Nadler 1996, p. 147). This article focuses on those texts and positions of Arnauld’s that are of the most philosophical interest.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Works
    1. The Life of Arnauld
    2. Philosophical Works
    3. The Leibniz-Arnauld Correspondence and the Malebranche-Arnauld Polemic
  2. Arnauld's Cartesianism
  3. The Fourth Objections
  4. The Nature of Arnauld’s Cartesianism
  5. Arnauld's Cartesian Ontology: Dual Dualisms
  6. Philosophical Methodology
  7. Occasionalism
  8. Conception of God and Theodicy
    1. The Doctrine of the Creation of the Eternal Truths
    2. Theodicy
    3. Arnauld’s God
  9. Modality
  10. Conclusion
  11. References and Further Reading

1. Life and Works

a. The Life of Arnauld

Antoine Arnauld, often referred to as “le grand Arnauld” on account of his small physical stature, was first and foremost a theologian (Sedgwick 1998, p. 124). He was born on February 6th, 1612 into a well-regarded family in Paris. After briefly considering following his late father and pursuing a career in law, Arnauld decided, largely at the bequest of his mother and family friend (and friend of Cornelius Jansen) Jean Duvergier, to pursue a life in theology and the Church (Kremer 1990, pp. xiv; Nadler 1989, pp. 15-16). In 1633, Arnauld began his studies at the Sorbonne in Paris and both received his doctorate in theology and became an ordained priest in 1641. Arnauld would go on to ultimately serve on the faculty of the Sorbonne (Nadler 1989, p. 16).

Arnauld’s life was tied to Jansenism and the monastery of Port-Royal. Port-Royal was a convent in France that shifted between two locations (and sometimes both), one just outside of Paris and one in Paris – Port Royal du Champs and Port Royal de Paris respectively. (Sleigh 1990, pp. 26-27). The Port-Royal was associated with Jansenism and was dedicated to intellectual pursuits and notably the education of children (Sleigh 1990, p. 27).

Jansenism is a now defunct sect of Catholicism that sought reform within the Roman Catholic Church. Indeed, many of Jansenism's critics argued that Jansenism was actually a brand of Protestantism and called the movement Jansenism to relate it to Calvinism, so named from John Calvin (Schmaltz 1999, p. 42). Jansenism developed out of the ideas of Cornelius Jansen and his book Augustinus. As the title suggests, Jansen defended an Augustinian inspired system. It is hard to outline many characteristics over and above being inspired by Jansen’s text and their views on grace that are representative of Jansenism or those associated with the Port-Royal (see, for example, Schmaltz 1999). For example, while the Port-Royal had long been associated with Cartesianism, recent research suggests that many associated with the Port-Royal were in fact anti-Cartesian (see, for example, Nadler 1988b). Nevertheless, the central claim of the Jansenist cause that occupies much of Arnauld’s attention at points in his career and plays a fundamental role in several of Arnauld's most interesting philosophical contributions is the Augustinian doctrine of efficacious grace. This doctrine of efficacious grace held that one did not achieve salvation by one’s own merit, but only through the grace of God. Further, if one received God’s grace, one could not fail to achieve salvation. In other words, grace was given (or not given) by God and not earned by one’s own actions (Nadler 1989, p. 16 and Nadler 2008b, pp. 56-57). A second aspect of Jansenist doctrine (or at least Arnauld’s Jansenism) that plays a central role in Arnauld’s philosophical endeavors is a commitment to a “hidden God” (Moreau 2000, p. 106). By a “hidden God”, Arnauld at least, does not mean to claim that God’s works are unknowable or that we can know nothing about God, but rather that in some very substantive ways God is not fully comprehendible by us (see section 5).

Arnauld had a fundamental role in the “Quarrel over the Five Propositions”. In 1653, Pope Innocent X declared the following five propositions heretical. All five of these, the Pope claimed, were endorsed by Jansen in Augustinus:

  1. Some commandments of God are impossible for righteous men, although they wish to fulfill them and strive to fulfill them in accord with the power they presently possess. They lack the grace that would make it possible.
  2. In the state of fallen nature, interior grace is never resisted.
  3. In order to deserve merit or demerit in the state of fallen nature, freedom from necessity is not required in men; rather, freedom from constraint is sufficient.
  4. The Semi-Pelagians admitted the necessity of prevenient and interior grace for each action, even for the beginning of faith; but they were heretics in that they held hat this grace is such that the human will can either resist it or obey it.
  5. It is an error of the Semi-Pelagians to say that Christ dies or that he shed his blood for everyone without exception. [See, for example, Sleigh (1990), p. 27, from whom the translations are taken]

Arnauld refused to submit to Papal authority and accept that Jansen’s text was heretical. While Arnauld granted that the Pope had the authority to decide what was or was not heretical, he denied that the Pope had a similar authority in interpreting Augustinus. In fact, Arnauld argued, Jansen endorses none of these propositions in Augustinus. This incident between the Pope and Jansenists like Arnauld, resulted in much persecution for Arnauld and other Jansenists and those who did not submit to Papal authority. Further, as a result of this incident, Arnauld was removed from the faculty of the Sorbonne in 1656 (Kremer 1990, pp. xv-xvi and Sleigh 1990, pp. 27-28). In 1679, Arnauld went into exile in the Netherlands, during which time he even used a fake name (Monsieur Davy) and never returned to France (Sleigh 1990, p. 26/Jacques 1976, p. 34]. Arnauld died August 8th 1694, in Liège.

[For more information on the life of Arnauld and from which the above account is taken, see especially: Nadler (1989) Chapter II; Kremer (1990); Sleigh (1990) Chapter 3; and Sedgwick (1998), especially Chapter 7. For a general book length-study of 17th Century French Jansenism, see Sedgwick (1977)].

b. Philosophical Works



In the course of his life, Arnauld wrote a substantial amount on both theology and philosophy. Those philosophical writings that are of the most importance are briefly discussed here.

While studying at the Sorbonne, Arnauld authored the aforementioned Fourth Objections to Descartes’ Meditations. In November of 1640, Descartes asked Marin Mersenne (who was the center of the Parisian intellectual world) to circulate copies of the Meditations among other thinkers in Paris to acquire comments and objections so that Descartes could publish them with the first printing of the Meditations. While the group of objectors included Pierre Gassendi, Thomas Hobbes and Marin Mersenne, Descartes claimed of Arnauld’s objections, “I think they are the best of all the sets of objections” (CSMK III 175/AT III 331). Arnauld’s objections to the Mediations have many distinctive features. For example, unlike the objections of Hobbes and Gassendi, Arnauld’s objections to the Meditations are not objections to Descartes’ system, but objections internal to Descartes’ system. Further, Arnauld’s objections resulted in changes in the actual body of the Meditations (see for example, Carraud 1995, pp. 110-111). Some of Arnauld’s objections are discussed below (section 2a). In addition to the Fourth Objections and Fourth Replies, Arnauld and Descartes exchanged two letters each in 1648 wherein Arnauld further presses Descartes on matters related to the Cartesian philosophy (although it is worth noting that Arnauld remained anonymous in these letters). These two letters are often called “The New Objections to Descartes’ Meditations” (and are available in English translation in Kremer’s translation of On True and False Ideas 1990). In these works, Arnauld pushes Descartes for further clarification of central aspects of the Cartesian worldview while simultaneously showing sympathy to that worldview.

Arnauld co-authored works with other Port-Royalists, two of which deserve special mention. The first of these is the Port-Royal Grammar. In this 1660 work Arnauld and co-author Claude Lancelot, construct a general text on grammar, which they define as “the art of speaking” (PRG 41/OA 41 5). They define speaking as “explaining one’s thoughts by signs which men have invented for that purpose” (PRG 41/OA 41 5). In 1662, Arnauld co-wrote a similar work called La Logique, ou L’art de Penser, that is The Logic or the Art of Thinking (henceforth: Logic) with Pierre Nicole. Arnauld and Nicole understand the purpose of logic to “give rules for all actions of the mind, and for simple ideas as well as for judgments and inferences” (B 15/OA 41 27). Thus, Arnauld and Nicole aim to produce a text based on reasoning well and making good judgments. Arnauld and Nicole divide the text into four parts: conceiving, judging, reasoning and ordering. Conceiving is “the simple view we have of things that present themselves to the mind” and is what we do when we represent things to the mind in the form of ideas before making judgments about them. Judging is the act of bringing together different ideas in the mind and affirming or denying one or the other. Reasoning is the “action of the mind in which it forms a judgment from several others.” Ordering (or method) is the mental action of arranging “ideas, judgments and reasonings” in such a way that the arrangement is “best suited for knowing the subject” (B 23/OA 41 125). The Logic is very influential. So influential, in fact, it has been claimed that “The Port-Royal Logic was the most influential logic from Aristotle to the end of the nineteenth century” (Buroker 1996, p. xxiii). Further, while the text is ostensibly one about logic, it also treats extensively metaphysics, philosophy of language, epistemology, theory of ideas and philosophy of religion.

Arnauld wrote a majority of his philosophical work while in exile. In Examen d’un Ecrit qui a pour titre: Traité de l’essence du the corps, et de l’union de l’âme avec le corps, contre la philosophie de M. Descartes, that is, an Examination of a Writing that has for a title: Treatise on the essence of the body, and the union of the soul with the body, against the philosophy of Mr. Descartes (henceforth Examen), Arnauld responds to an attack on Cartesianism by M. Le Moine, Dean of the Chapter of Vitre. The treaty to which Arnauld is responding is now lost (Schmaltz 2002, p. 54; Nadler 1989, p. 26, n 18). In this work, Arnauld defends a Cartesian philosophy, though not an entirely orthodox Cartesianism (see section 4). Arnauld divided the text into four sections: whether Descartes’ philosophy can add anything valuable over and above what scripture tells us; that Descartes’ philosophy is consistent with the Catholic stance on the Eucharist – a Catholic ceremony in which wine and bread are blessed by a priest and the wine and bread, which in the 17th century are taken to either be converted into, or annihilated and replaced by, Christ’s blood and body (see, for example, Nadler 1988, p. 230); that Descartes does not ruin the Church’s belief in the glory of the body; and on the union of the soul and the body. [For a thorough treatment of Arnauld, Descartes and the Eucharist, see Nadler (1988) and Schmaltz (2002), Chapter 1]. The Examen (1680) is especially notable as Arnauld was explicitly defending a Cartesian philosophy, even after Descartes’ works were condemned by the Congregation of the Index in 1663. To have one’s works condemned by the Congregation of the Index was having them being banned by the Catholic Church (see for example, Nadler 1988, p. 239).

c. The Leibniz-Arnauld Correspondence and the Malebranche-Arnauld Polemic


In addition to the philosophical works described above, Arnauld participated in two events in the 17th century of immense importance, namely the Leibniz-Arnauld correspondence and the Malebranche-Arnauld polemic. The most famous part of the correspondence with Leibniz (indeed the part normally referred to as the “Leibniz-Arnauld Correspondence”) began in February of 1686 when Leibniz wrote to the Landgrave Ernst von Hessen-Rheinfels. Leibniz sent an outline of what would become one of Leibniz's most important works, the Discourse on Metaphysics, and asked if the Landgrave could give the outline to Arnauld in hopes that Arnauld would comment on it. Arnauld and Leibniz then corresponded with Hessen-Rheinfels as an intermediary. Arnauld’s initial response to Leibniz gives some justification of his reputation as a harsh critic and hot-tempered person. Arnauld claims that Leibniz’s work contains “so many things that frighten me and that almost all men, if I am not mistaken, will find so shocking, that I do not see what use such a work can be, which will clearly be rejected by everybody” (M 9/G II 15). Arnauld adds “Would it not be better if he [Leibniz] abandoned these metaphysical speculations which cannot be of use to him or others, in order to apply himself seriously to the greatest business that he can ever have, the assurance of his salvation by returning to the Church” (M 10/G II 16). In Arnauld’s second letter to Leibniz, he apologizes and offers a more thorough account of what he found so troubling in Leibniz’s philosophy.  It is this letter that begins a philosophical exchange whose rigor rivals the best published philosophical works of the period.

The correspondence had a profound effect on the development of Leibniz’s metaphysical system, so much so that Leibniz considered publishing the correspondence (G I 420, see also Sleigh 1990, p. 1). Further, as we shall see below, Arnauld offers some original contributions in the discussion, most notably concerning modal metaphysics or the nature of possibility. However, it is worth briefly noting two of Arnauld’s objections to Leibniz’s system before we move on. First, Arnauld objects to Leibniz’s account of pre-established harmony. In the Discourse on Metaphysics, Leibniz defends pre-established harmony or as Arnauld refers to it “the hypothesis of the concomitance and harmony between substances” (M 78/G II 64). Leibniz’s view, in brief, is that each substance causes all of its own changes and there is no causation or causal relations between two distinct finite substances. Instead, according to Leibniz, God has set up the universe so that at the exact moment that, for example, Arnauld speaks to Leibniz, Leibniz’s own substance changes itself in such a way that Leibniz hears Arnauld. For example, in the Discourse Leibniz claims:

We could therefore say...that one particular substance never acts upon another particular substance nor is acted upon by it. (AG 47/G IV 358)


God alone (from whom all individuals emanate continually and who sees the universe not only as they see it but also entirely different from all of them) is the cause of the correspondence of their phenomena and makes that which is particular to one of them public to all of them; otherwise, there would be no interconnection. (AG 47/G IV 375)

Arnauld pushes Leibniz to clarify his view (M 78/G II 64) and then argues that Leibniz’s view collapses into a different account of causation prevalent in the 17th century: occasionalism (M 105-106/G II 84-85). The traditional doctrine of occasionalism, most closely associated with the Cartesian Nicolas Malebranche, is the conjunction of the following two claims:

  1. Finite beings have no causal power.
  2. God is the only true causal agent.

According to occasionalism, only God has causal power. When it appears to us that a baseball breaks a window, it is not the case that the baseball (a finite thing) exercises any causal efficacy over the window. Instead, God, on the occasion of the baseball striking the window, causes the window to break. The baseball in this case is often called an “occasional cause”.  However, one should not mistake an occasional cause as something with causal power, rather it simply signifies the occasion for God to exercise His causal power. Returning to Arnauld’s objection to Leibniz, he explains:

It seems to me that this [the concomitance and harmony between substances] is saying the same thing in other words as those who claim that my will is the occasional cause of the movement of my arm and God is the real cause. For they do not claim that God does that in time through a new act of will which he exercises each time I wish to raise my arm; but by that single act of the eternal will (M 105-106/G II 84).

Arnauld’s concern is that if substances are not causally affecting each other, and the correspondence of seeming causal relations occurs only because of God setting it up so that these relations correspond, how could this view be any different than claiming that only God is causally efficacious? We might restate Arnauld’s question as follows: Given that God wills things, not one at a time, but from a single eternal will, how is it any different for God to will from a single act of the eternal will that all ‘interactions’ between different substances correspond with no actual causal relations between them and for God to will the relations between the two substances themselves?

Arnauld may have misunderstood Leibniz in this regard [see, for example, Sleigh (1990), p. 150], as Leibniz would claim that each substance causes its own changes and insist that this is substantively different from occasionalism. However, Arnauld’s objections to Leibniz, at the least, push Leibniz to explain his view, and at best do not suffer from and rely on a misunderstanding of Leibniz’s position and offer a legitimate problem for Leibniz’s view.

Arnauld also criticizes Leibniz’s account substances. According to Leibniz, each created substance has a certain ‘form’ that constitutes its essence (see, for example, Sleigh 1990, p. 116). A full (or even adequate) account of Leibniz on this issue would take us on a long detour. For our purposes we can focus on one particular aspect of what Leibniz says:

If the body is a substance…[and not] an entity united by accident or by aggregation like a heap of stones, it cannot consist of extension, and one must necessarily conceive of something there that one calls a [form], and which corresponds in a way to a soul. (M 66/G II 58)

Take for example a human body. We naturally think of the human body, say Arnauld’s body, as an individual thing with some sort of unity or togetherness. According to Descartes and Arnauld (see section 2c) bodies are essentially extended things and are infinitely divisible. That is, for any body, that body can be divided into an infinite number of parts. Leibniz claims in this passage that if there are extended bodies they cannot be simply things like heaps of stone or simple aggregates. There must be something that unifies the