Category Archives: Philosophers

Sigmund Freud (1856—1939)

freudSigmund Freud, the father of psychoanalysis, was a physiologist, medical doctor, psychologist and influential thinker of the early twentieth century. Working initially in close collaboration with Joseph Breuer, Freud elaborated the theory that the mind is a complex energy-system, the structural investigation of which is the proper province of psychology. He articulated and refined the concepts of the unconscious, infantile sexuality and repression, and he proposed a tripartite account of the mind’s structure—all as part of a radically new conceptual and therapeutic frame of reference for the understanding of human psychological development and the treatment of abnormal mental conditions. Notwithstanding the multiple manifestations of psychoanalysis as it exists today, it can in almost all fundamental respects be traced directly back to Freud’s original work.

Freud’s innovative treatment of human actions, dreams, and indeed of cultural artifacts as invariably possessing implicit symbolic significance has proven to be extraordinarily fruitful, and has had massive implications for a wide variety of fields including psychology, anthropology, semiotics, and artistic creativity and appreciation. However, Freud’s most important and frequently re-iterated claim, that with psychoanalysis he had invented a successful science of the mind, remains the subject of much critical debate and controversy.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Backdrop to His Thought
  3. The Theory of the Unconscious
  4. Infantile Sexuality
  5. Neuroses and The Structure of the Mind
  6. Psychoanalysis as a Therapy
  7. Critical Evaluation of Freud
    1. The Claim to Scientific Status
    2. The Coherence of the Theory
    3. Freud's Discovery
    4. The Efficacy of Psychoanalytic Therapy
  8. References and Further Reading
    1. Works by Freud
    2. Works on Freud and Freudian Psychoanalysis

1. Life

Freud was born in Frieberg, Moravia in 1856, but when he was four years old his family moved to Vienna where he was to live and work until the last years of his life. In 1938 the Nazis annexed Austria, and Freud, who was Jewish, was allowed to leave for England. For these reasons, it was above all with the city of Vienna that Freud’s name was destined to be deeply associated for posterity, founding as he did what was to become known as the ‘first Viennese school’ of psychoanalysis from which flowed psychoanalysis as a movement and all subsequent developments in this field. The scope of Freud’s interests, and of his professional training, was very broad. He always considered himself first and foremost a scientist, endeavoring to extend the compass of human knowledge, and to this end (rather than to the practice of medicine) he enrolled at the medical school at the University of Vienna in 1873. He concentrated initially on biology, doing research in physiology for six years under the great German scientist Ernst Brücke, who was director of the Physiology Laboratory at the University, and thereafter specializing in neurology. He received his medical degree in 1881, and having become engaged to be married in 1882, he rather reluctantly took up more secure and financially rewarding work as a doctor at Vienna General Hospital. Shortly after his marriage in 1886, which was extremely happy and gave Freud six children—the youngest of whom, Anna, was to herself become a distinguished psychoanalyst—Freud set up a private practice in the treatment of psychological disorders, which gave him much of the clinical material that he based his theories and pioneering techniques on.

In 1885-86, Freud spent the greater part of a year in Paris, where he was deeply impressed by the work of the French neurologist Jean Charcot who was at that time using hypnotism to treat hysteria and other abnormal mental conditions. When he returned to Vienna, Freud experimented with hypnosis but found that its beneficial effects did not last. At this point he decided to adopt instead a method suggested by the work of an older Viennese colleague and friend, Josef Breuer, who had discovered that when he encouraged a hysterical patient to talk uninhibitedly about the earliest occurrences of the symptoms, they sometimes gradually abated. Working with Breuer, Freud formulated and developed the idea that many neuroses (phobias, hysterical paralysis and pains, some forms of paranoia, and so forth) had their origins in deeply traumatic experiences which had occurred in the patient’s past but which were now forgotten–hidden from consciousness. The treatment was to enable the patient to recall the experience to consciousness, to confront it in a deep way both intellectually and emotionally, and in thus discharging it, to remove the underlying psychological causes of the neurotic symptoms. This technique, and the theory from which it is derived, was given its classical expression in Studies in Hysteria, jointly published by Freud and Breuer in 1895.

Shortly thereafter, however, Breuer found that he could not agree with what he regarded as the excessive emphasis which Freud placed upon the sexual origins and content of neuroses, and the two parted company, with Freud continuing to work alone to develop and refine the theory and practice of psychoanalysis. In 1900, after a protracted period of self-analysis, he published The Interpretation of Dreams, which is generally regarded as his greatest work. This was followed in 1901 by The Psychopathology of Everyday Life; and in 1905 by Three Essays on the Theory of Sexuality. Freud’s psychoanalytic theory was initially not well received–when its existence was acknowledged at all it was usually by people who were, as Breuer had foreseen, scandalized by the emphasis placed on sexuality by Freud. It was not until 1908, when the first International Psychoanalytical Congress was held at Salzburg that Freud’s importance began to be generally recognized. This was greatly facilitated in 1909, when he was invited to give a course of lectures in the United States, which were to form the basis of his 1916 book Five Lectures on Psycho-Analysis. From this point on Freud’s reputation and fame grew enormously, and he continued to write prolifically until his death, producing in all more than twenty volumes of theoretical works and clinical studies. He was also not averse to critically revising his views, or to making fundamental alterations to his most basic principles when he considered that the scientific evidence demanded it–this was most clearly evidenced by his advancement of a completely new tripartite (id, ego, and super-ego) model of the mind in his 1923 work The Ego and the Id. He was initially greatly heartened by attracting followers of the intellectual caliber of Adler and Jung, and was correspondingly disappointed when they both went on to found rival schools of psychoanalysis–thus giving rise to the first two of many schisms in the movement–but he knew that such disagreement over basic principles had been part of the early development of every new science. After a life of remarkable vigor and creative productivity, he died of cancer while exiled in England in 1939.

2. Backdrop to His Thought

Although a highly original thinker, Freud was also deeply influenced by a number of diverse factors which overlapped and interconnected with each other to shape the development of his thought. As indicated above, both Charcot and Breuer had a direct and immediate impact upon him, but some of the other factors, though no less important than these, were of a rather different nature. First of all, Freud himself was very much a Freudian–his father had two sons by a previous marriage, Emmanuel and Philip, and the young Freud often played with Philip’s son John, who was his own age. Freud’s self-analysis, which forms the core of his masterpiece The Interpretation of Dreams, originated in the emotional crisis which he suffered on the death of his father and the series of dreams to which this gave rise. This analysis revealed to him that the love and admiration which he had felt for his father were mixed with very contrasting feelings of shame and hate (such a mixed attitude he termed ‘ambivalence’). Particularly revealing was his discovery that he had often fantasized as a youth that his half-brother Philip (who was of an age with his mother) was really his father, and certain other signs convinced him of the deep underlying meaning of this fantasy–that he had wished his real father dead because he was his rival for his mother’s affections. This was to become the personal (though by no means exclusive) basis for his theory of the Oedipus complex.

Secondly, and at a more general level, account must be taken of the contemporary scientific climate in which Freud lived and worked. In most respects, the towering scientific figure of nineteenth century science was Charles Darwin, who had published his revolutionary Origin of Species when Freud was four years old. The evolutionary doctrine radically altered the prevailing conception of man–whereas before, man had been seen as a being different in nature from the members of the animal kingdom by virtue of his possession of an immortal soul, he was now seen as being part of the natural order, different from non-human animals only in degree of structural complexity. This made it possible and plausible, for the first time, to treat man as an object of scientific investigation, and to conceive of the vast and varied range of human behavior, and the motivational causes from which it springs, as being amenable in principle to scientific explanation. Much of the creative work done in a whole variety of diverse scientific fields over the next century was to be inspired by, and derive sustenance from, this new world-view, which Freud with his enormous esteem for science, accepted implicitly.

An even more important influence on Freud however, came from the field of physics. The second fifty years of the nineteenth century saw monumental advances in contemporary physics, which were largely initiated by the formulation of the principle of the conservation of energy by Helmholz. This principle states, in effect, that the total amount of energy in any given physical system is always constant, that energy quanta can be changed but not annihilated, and that consequently when energy is moved from one part of the system, it must reappear in another part. The progressive application of this principle led to monumental discoveries in the fields of thermodynamics, electromagnetism and nuclear physics which, with their associated technologies, have so comprehensively transformed the contemporary world. As we have seen, when he first came to the University of Vienna, Freud worked under the direction of Ernst Brücke who in 1874 published a book setting out the view that all living organisms, including humans, are essentially energy-systems to which, no less than to inanimate objects, the principle of the conservation of energy applies. Freud, who had great admiration and respect for Brücke, quickly adopted this new "dynamic physiology" with enthusiasm. From there it was but a short conceptual step—but one which Freud was the first to take, and on which his claim to fame is largely grounded—to the view that there is such a thing as "psychic energy," that the human personality is also an energy-system, and that it is the function of psychology to investigate the modifications, transmissions and conversions of psychic energy within the personality which shape and determine it. This latter conception is the very cornerstone of Freud’s psychoanalytic theory.

3. The Theory of the Unconscious

Freud’s theory of the unconscious, then, is highly deterministic—a fact which, given the nature of nineteenth century science, should not be surprising. Freud was arguably the first thinker to apply deterministic principles systematically to the sphere of the mental, and to hold that the broad spectrum of human behavior is explicable only in terms of the (usually hidden) mental processes or states which determine it. Thus, instead of treating the behavior of the neurotic as being causally inexplicable—which had been the prevailing approach for centuries—Freud insisted, on the contrary, on treating it as behavior for which it is meaningful to seek an explanation by searching for causes in terms of the mental states of the individual concerned. Hence the significance which he attributed to slips of the tongue or pen, obsessive behavior and dreams—all these, he held, are determined by hidden causes in the person’s mind, and so they reveal in covert form what would otherwise not be known at all. This suggests the view that freedom of the will is, if not completely an illusion, certainly more tightly circumscribed than is commonly believed, for it follows from this that whenever we make a choice we are governed by hidden mental processes of which we are unaware and over which we have no control.

The postulate that there are such things as unconscious mental states at all is a direct function of Freud’s determinism, his reasoning here being simply that the principle of causality requires that such mental states should exist, for it is evident that there is frequently nothing in the conscious mind which can be said to cause neurotic or other behavior. An ‘unconscious’ mental process or event, for Freud, is not one which merely happens to be out of consciousness at a given time, but is rather one which cannot, except through protracted psychoanalysis, be brought to the forefront of consciousness. The postulation of such unconscious mental states entails, of course, that the mind is not, and cannot be, either identified with consciousness, or an object of consciousness. To employ a much-used analogy, it is rather structurally akin to an iceberg, the bulk of it lying below the surface, exerting a dynamic and determining influence upon the part which is amenable to direct inspection—the conscious mind.

Deeply associated with this view of the mind is Freud’s account of instincts or drives. Instincts, for Freud, are the principal motivating forces in the mental realm, and as such they ‘energise’ the mind in all of its functions. There are, he held, an indefinitely large number of such instincts, but these can be reduced to a small number of basic ones, which he grouped into two broad generic categories, Eros (the life instinct), which covers all the self-preserving and erotic instincts, and Thanatos (the death instinct), which covers all the instincts towards aggression, self-destruction, and cruelty. Thus it is a mistake to interpret Freud as asserting that all human actions spring from motivations which are sexual in their origin, since those which derive from Thanatos are not sexually motivated–indeed, Thanatos is the irrational urge to destroy the source of all sexual energy in the annihilation of the self. Having said that, it is undeniably true that Freud gave sexual drives an importance and centrality in human life, human actions, and human behavior which was new (and to many, shocking), arguing as he does that sexual drives exist and can be discerned in children from birth (the theory of infantile sexuality), and that sexual energy (libido) is the single most important motivating force in adult life. However, a crucial qualification has to be added here—Freud effectively redefined the term "sexuality" to make it cover any form of pleasure which is or can be derived from the body. Thus his theory of the instincts or drives is essentially that the human being is energized or driven from birth by the desire to acquire and enhance bodily pleasure.

4. Infantile Sexuality

Freud’s theory of infantile sexuality must be seen as an integral part of a broader developmental theory of human personality. This had its origins in, and was a generalization of, Breuer’s earlier discovery that traumatic childhood events could have devastating negative effects upon the adult individual, and took the form of the general thesis that early childhood sexual experiences were the crucial factors in the determination of the adult personality. From his account of the instincts or drives it followed that from the moment of birth the infant is driven in his actions by the desire for bodily/sexual pleasure, where this is seen by Freud in almost mechanical terms as the desire to release mental energy. Initially, infants gain such release, and derive such pleasure, from the act of sucking. Freud accordingly terms this the "oral" stage of development. This is followed by a stage in which the locus of pleasure or energy release is the anus, particularly in the act of defecation, and this is accordingly termed the ‘anal’ stage. Then the young child develops an interest in its sexual organs as a site of pleasure (the "phallic" stage), and develops a deep sexual attraction for the parent of the opposite sex, and a hatred of the parent of the same sex (the "Oedipus complex"). This, however, gives rise to (socially derived) feelings of guilt in the child, who recognizes that it can never supplant the stronger parent. A male child also perceives himself to be at risk. He fears that if he persists in pursuing the sexual attraction for his mother, he may be harmed by the father; specifically, he comes to fear that he may be castrated. This is termed "castration anxiety." Both the attraction for the mother and the hatred are usually repressed, and the child usually resolves the conflict of the Oedipus complex by coming to identify with the parent of the same sex. This happens at the age of five, whereupon the child enters a "latency" period, in which sexual motivations become much less pronounced. This lasts until puberty when mature genital development begins, and the pleasure drive refocuses around the genital area.

This, Freud believed, is the sequence or progression implicit in normal human development, and it is to be observed that at the infant level the instinctual attempts to satisfy the pleasure drive are frequently checked by parental control and social coercion. The developmental process, then, is for the child essentially a movement through a series of conflicts, the successful resolution of which is crucial to adult mental health. Many mental illnesses, particularly hysteria, Freud held, can be traced back to unresolved conflicts experienced at this stage, or to events which otherwise disrupt the normal pattern of infantile development. For example, homosexuality is seen by some Freudians as resulting from a failure to resolve the conflicts of the Oedipus complex, particularly a failure to identify with the parent of the same sex; the obsessive concern with washing and personal hygiene which characterizes the behavior of some neurotics is seen as resulting from unresolved conflicts/repressions occurring at the anal stage.

5. Neuroses and The Structure of the Mind

Freud’s account of the unconscious, and the psychoanalytic therapy associated with it, is best illustrated by his famous tripartite model of the structure of the mind or personality (although, as we have seen, he did not formulate this until 1923). This model has many points of similarity with the account of the mind offered by Plato over 2,000 years earlier. The theory is termed ‘tripartite’ simply because, again like Plato, Freud distinguished three structural elements within the mind, which he called id, ego, and super-ego. The id is that part of the mind in which are situated the instinctual sexual drives which require satisfaction; the super-ego is that part which contains the "conscience," namely, socially-acquired control mechanisms which have been internalized, and which are usually imparted in the first instance by the parents; while the ego is the conscious self that is created by the dynamic tensions and interactions between the id and the super-ego and has the task of reconciling their conflicting demands with the requirements of external reality. It is in this sense that the mind is to be understood as a dynamic energy-system. All objects of consciousness reside in the ego; the contents of the id belong permanently to the unconscious mind; while the super-ego is an unconscious screening-mechanism which seeks to limit the blind pleasure-seeking drives of the id by the imposition of restrictive rules. There is some debate as to how literally Freud intended this model to be taken (he appears to have taken it extremely literally himself), but it is important to note that what is being offered here is indeed a theoretical model rather than a description of an observable object, which functions as a frame of reference to explain the link between early childhood experience and the mature adult (normal or dysfunctional) personality.

Freud also followed Plato in his account of the nature of mental health or psychological well-being, which he saw as the establishment of a harmonious relationship between the three elements which constitute the mind. If the external world offers no scope for the satisfaction of the id’s pleasure drives, or more commonly, if the satisfaction of some or all of these drives would indeed transgress the moral sanctions laid down by the super-ego, then an inner conflict occurs in the mind between its constituent parts or elements. Failure to resolve this can lead to later neurosis. A key concept introduced here by Freud is that the mind possesses a number of ‘defense mechanisms’ to attempt to prevent conflicts from becoming too acute, such as repression (pushing conflicts back into the unconscious), sublimation (channeling the sexual drives into the achievement socially acceptable goals, in art, science, poetry, and so forth), fixation (the failure to progress beyond one of the developmental stages), and regression (a return to the behavior characteristic of one of the stages).

Of these, repression is the most important, and Freud’s account of this is as follows: when a person experiences an instinctual impulse to behave in a manner which the super-ego deems to be reprehensible (for example, a strong erotic impulse on the part of the child towards the parent of the opposite sex), then it is possible for the mind to push this impulse away, to repress it into the unconscious. Repression is thus one of the central defense mechanisms by which the ego seeks to avoid internal conflict and pain, and to reconcile reality with the demands of both id and super-ego. As such it is completely normal and an integral part of the developmental process through which every child must pass on the way to adulthood. However, the repressed instinctual drive, as an energy-form, is not and cannot be destroyed when it is repressed–it continues to exist intact in the unconscious, from where it exerts a determining force upon the conscious mind, and can give rise to the dysfunctional behavior characteristic of neuroses. This is one reason why dreams and slips of the tongue possess such a strong symbolic significance for Freud, and why their analysis became such a key part of his treatment–they represent instances in which the vigilance of the super-ego is relaxed, and when the repressed drives are accordingly able to present themselves to the conscious mind in a transmuted form. The difference between ‘normal’ repression and the kind of repression which results in neurotic illness is one of degree, not of kind–the compulsive behavior of the neurotic is itself a manifestation of an instinctual drive repressed in childhood. Such behavioral symptoms are highly irrational (and may even be perceived as such by the neurotic), but are completely beyond the control of the subject because they are driven by the now unconscious repressed impulse. Freud positioned the key repressions for both, the normal individual and the neurotic, in the first five years of childhood, and of course, held them to be essentially sexual in nature;–since, as we have seen, repressions which disrupt the process of infantile sexual development in particular, according to him, lead to a strong tendency to later neurosis in adult life. The task of psychoanalysis as a therapy is to find the repressions which cause the neurotic symptoms by delving into the unconscious mind of the subject, and by bringing them to the forefront of consciousness, to allow the ego to confront them directly and thus to discharge them.

6. Psychoanalysis as a Therapy

Freud’s account of the sexual genesis and nature of neuroses led him naturally to develop a clinical treatment for treating such disorders. This has become so influential today that when people speak of psychoanalysis they frequently refer exclusively to the clinical treatment; however, the term properly designates both the clinical treatment and the theory which underlies it. The aim of the method may be stated simply in general terms–to re-establish a harmonious relationship between the three elements which constitute the mind by excavating and resolving unconscious repressed conflicts. The actual method of treatment pioneered by Freud grew out of Breuer’s earlier discovery, mentioned above, that when a hysterical patient was encouraged to talk freely about the earliest occurrences of her symptoms and fantasies, the symptoms began to abate, and were eliminated entirely when she was induced to remember the initial trauma which occasioned them. Turning away from his early attempts to explore the unconscious through hypnosis, Freud further developed this "talking cure," acting on the assumption that the repressed conflicts were buried in the deepest recesses of the unconscious mind. Accordingly, he got his patients to relax in a position in which they were deprived of strong sensory stimulation, and even keen awareness of the presence of the analyst (hence the famous use of the couch, with the analyst virtually silent and out of sight), and then encouraged them to speak freely and uninhibitedly, preferably without forethought, in the belief that he could thereby discern the unconscious forces lying behind what was said. This is the method of free-association, the rationale for which is similar to that involved in the analysis of dreams—in both cases the super-ego is to some degree disarmed, its efficiency as a screening mechanism is moderated, and material is allowed to filter through to the conscious ego which would otherwise be completely repressed. The process is necessarily a difficult and protracted one, and it is therefore one of the primary tasks of the analyst to help the patient recognize, and overcome, his own natural resistances, which may exhibit themselves as hostility towards the analyst. However, Freud always took the occurrence of resistance as a sign that he was on the right track in his assessment of the underlying unconscious causes of the patient’s condition. The patient’s dreams are of particular interest, for reasons which we have already partly seen. Taking it that the super-ego functioned less effectively in sleep, as in free association, Freud made a distinction between the manifest content of a dream (what the dream appeared to be about on the surface) and its latent content (the unconscious, repressed desires or wishes which are its real object). The correct interpretation of the patient’s dreams, slips of tongue, free-associations, and responses to carefully selected questions leads the analyst to a point where he can locate the unconscious repressions producing the neurotic symptoms, invariably in terms of the patient’s passage through the sexual developmental process, the manner in which the conflicts implicit in this process were handled, and the libidinal content of the patient’s family relationships. To effect a cure, the analyst must facilitate the patient himself to become conscious of unresolved conflicts buried in the deep recesses of the unconscious mind, and to confront and engage with them directly.

In this sense, then, the object of psychoanalytic treatment may be said to be a form of self-understanding–once this is acquired it is largely up to the patient, in consultation with the analyst, to determine how he shall handle this newly-acquired understanding of the unconscious forces which motivate him. One possibility, mentioned above, is the channeling of sexual energy into the achievement of social, artistic or scientific goals–this is sublimation, which Freud saw as the motivating force behind most great cultural achievements. Another possibility would be the conscious, rational control of formerly repressed drives–this is suppression. Yet another would be the decision that it is the super-ego and the social constraints which inform it that are at fault, in which case the patient may decide in the end to satisfy the instinctual drives. But in all cases the cure is effected essentially by a kind of catharsis or purgation–a release of the pent-up psychic energy, the constriction of which was the basic cause of the neurotic illness.

7. Critical Evaluation of Freud

It should be evident from the foregoing why psychoanalysis in general, and Freud in particular, have exerted such a strong influence upon the popular imagination in the Western World, and why both the theory and practice of psychoanalysis should remain the object of a great deal of controversy. In fact, the controversy which exists in relation to Freud is more heated and multi-faceted than that relating to virtually any other post-1850 thinker (a possible exception being Darwin), with criticisms ranging from the contention that Freud’s theory was generated by logical confusions arising out of his alleged long-standing addiction to cocaine (see Thornton, E.M. Freud and Cocaine: The Freudian Fallacy) to the view that he made an important, but grim, empirical discovery, which he knowingly suppressed in favour of the theory of the unconscious, knowing that the latter would be more socially acceptable (see Masson, J. The Assault on Truth).

It should be emphasized here that Freud’s genius is not (generally) in doubt, but the precise nature of his achievement is still the source of much debate. The supporters and followers of Freud (and Jung and Adler) are noted for the zeal and enthusiasm with which they espouse the doctrines of the master, to the point where many of the detractors of the movement see it as a kind of secular religion, requiring as it does an initiation process in which the aspiring psychoanalyst must himself first be analyzed. In this way, it is often alleged, the unquestioning acceptance of a set of ideological principles becomes a necessary precondition for acceptance into the movement–as with most religious groupings. In reply, the exponents and supporters of psychoanalysis frequently analyze the motivations of their critics in terms of the very theory which those critics reject. And so the debate goes on.

Here we will confine ourselves to: (a) the evaluation of Freud’s claim that his theory is a scientific one, (b) the question of the theory’s coherence, (c) the dispute concerning what, if anything, Freud really discovered, and (d) the question of the efficacy of psychoanalysis as a treatment for neurotic illnesses.

a. The Claim to Scientific Status

This is a crucially important issue since Freud saw himself first and foremost as a pioneering scientist, and repeatedly asserted that the significance of psychoanalysis is that it is a new science, incorporating a new scientific method of dealing with the mind and with mental illness. There can, moreover, be no doubt but that this has been the chief attraction of the theory for most of its advocates since then–on the face of it, it has the appearance of being not just a scientific theory but an enormously strong one, with the capacity to accommodate, and explain, every possible form of human behavior. However, it is precisely this latter which, for many commentators, undermines its claim to scientific status. On the question of what makes a theory a genuinely scientific one, Karl Popper’s criterion of demarcation, as it is called, has now gained very general acceptance: namely, that every genuine scientific theory must be testable, and therefore falsifiable, at least in principle. In other words, if a theory is incompatible with possible observations, it is scientific; conversely, a theory which is compatible with all possible observations is unscientific (see Popper, K. The Logic of Scientific Discovery). Thus the principle of the conservation of energy (physical, not psychic), which influenced Freud so greatly, is a scientific one because it is falsifiable–the discovery of a physical system in which the total amount of physical energy was not constant would conclusively show it to be false. It is argued that nothing of the kind is possible with respect to Freud’s theory–it is not falsifiable. If the question is asked: "What does this theory imply which, if false, would show the whole theory to be false?," the answer is "Nothing" because the theory is compatible with every possible state of affairs. Hence it is concluded that the theory is not scientific, and while this does not, as some critics claim, rob it of all value, it certainly diminishes its intellectual status as projected by its strongest advocates, including Freud himself.

b. The Coherence of the Theory

A related (but perhaps more serious) point is that the coherence of the theory is, at the very least, questionable. What is attractive about the theory, even to the layman, is that it seems to offer us long sought-after and much needed causal explanations for conditions which have been a source of a great deal of human misery. The thesis that neuroses are caused by unconscious conflicts buried deep in the unconscious mind in the form of repressed libidinal energy would appear to offer us, at last, an insight in the causal mechanism underlying these abnormal psychological conditions as they are expressed in human behavior, and further show us how they are related to the psychology of the ‘normal’ person. However, even this is questionable, and is a matter of much dispute. In general, when it is said that an event X causes another event Y to happen, both X and Y are, and must be, independently identifiable. It is true that this is not always a simple process, as in science causes are sometimes unobservable (sub-atomic particles, radio and electromagnetic waves, molecular structures, and so forth), but in these latter cases there are clear ‘correspondence rules’ connecting the unobservable causes with observable phenomena. The difficulty with Freud’s theory is that it offers us entities (for example repressed unconscious conflicts), which are said to be the unobservable causes of certain forms of behavior But there are no correspondence rules for these alleged causes–they cannot be identified except by reference to the behavior which they are said to cause (that is, the analyst does not demonstratively assert: "This is the unconscious cause, and that is its behavioral effect;" rather he asserts: "This is the behavior, therefore its unconscious cause must exist"), and this does raise serious doubts as to whether Freud’s theory offers us genuine causal explanations at all.

c. Freud's Discovery?

At a less theoretical, but no less critical level, it has been alleged that Freud did make a genuine discovery which he was initially prepared to reveal to the world. However, the response he encountered was so ferociously hostile that he masked his findings and offered his theory of the unconscious in its place (see Masson, J. The Assault on Truth). What he discovered, it has been suggested, was the extreme prevalence of child sexual abuse, particularly of young girls (the vast majority of hysterics are women), even in respectable nineteenth century Vienna. He did in fact offer an early "seduction theory" of neuroses, which met with fierce animosity, and which he quickly withdrew and replaced with the theory of the unconscious. As one contemporary Freudian commentator explains it, Freud’s change of mind on this issue came about as follows:

Questions concerning the traumas suffered by his patients seemed to reveal [to Freud] that Viennese girls were extraordinarily often seduced in very early childhood by older male relatives. Doubt about the actual occurrence of these seductions was soon replaced by certainty that it was descriptions about childhood fantasy that were being offered. (MacIntyre).

In this way, it is suggested, the theory of the Oedipus complex was generated.

This statement begs a number of questions, not least, what does the expression ‘extraordinarily often’ mean in this context? By what standard is this being judged? The answer can only be: By the standard of what we generally believe–or would like to believe–to be the case. But the contention of some of Freud’s critics here is that his patients were not recalling childhood fantasies, but traumatic events from their childhood which were all too real. Freud, according to them, had stumbled upon and knowingly suppressed the fact that the level of child sexual abuse in society is much higher than is generally believed or acknowledged. If this contention is true–and it must at least be contemplated seriously–then this is undoubtedly the most serious criticism that Freud and his followers have to face.

Further, this particular point has taken on an added and even more controversial significance in recent years, with the willingness of some contemporary Freudians to combine the theory of repression with an acceptance of the wide-spread social prevalence of child sexual abuse. The result has been that in the United States and Britain in particular, many thousands of people have emerged from analysis with ‘recovered memories’ of alleged childhood sexual abuse by their parents; memories which, it is suggested, were hitherto repressed. On this basis, parents have been accused and repudiated, and whole families have been divided or destroyed. Unsurprisingly, this in turn has given rise to a systematic backlash in which organizations of accused parents, seeing themselves as the true victims of what they term ‘False Memory Syndrome’, have denounced all such memory-claims as falsidical – the direct product of a belief in what they see as the myth of repression. (see Pendergast, M. Victims of Memory). In this way, the concept of repression, which Freud himself termed "the foundation stone upon which the structure of psychoanalysis rests," has come in for more widespread critical scrutiny than ever before. Here, the fact that, unlike some of his contemporary followers, Freud did not himself ever countenance the extension of the concept of repression to cover actual child sexual abuse, and the fact that we are not necessarily forced to choose between the views that all "recovered memories" are either veridical or falsidical are, perhaps understandably, frequently lost sight of in the extreme heat generated by this debate.

d. The Efficacy of Psychoanalytic Therapy

It does not follow that, if Freud’s theory is unscientific, or even false, it cannot provide us with a basis for the beneficial treatment of neurotic illness because the relationship between a theory’s truth or falsity and its utility-value is far from being an isomorphic one. (The theory upon which the use of leeches to bleed patients in eighteenth century medicine was based was quite spurious, but patients did sometimes actually benefit from the treatment!). And of course even a true theory might be badly applied, leading to negative consequences. One of the problems here is that it is difficult to specify what counts as a cure for a neurotic illness as distinct, say, from a mere alleviation of the symptoms. In general, however, the efficiency of a given method of treatment is usually clinically measured by means of a control group–the proportion of patients suffering from a given disorder who are cured by treatment X is measured by comparison with those cured by other treatments, or by no treatment at all. Such clinical tests as have been conducted indicate that the proportion of patients who have benefited from psychoanalytic treatment does not diverge significantly from the proportion who recover spontaneously or as a result of other forms of intervention in the control groups used. So, the question of the therapeutic effectiveness of psychoanalysis remains an open and controversial one.

8. References and Further Reading

a. Works by Freud

  • The Standard Edition of the Complete Psychological Works of Sigmund Freud (Ed. J. Strachey with Anna Freud), 24 vols. London: 1953-1964.

b. Works on Freud and Freudian Psychoanalysis

  • Abramson, J.B. Liberation and Its Limits: The Moral and Political Thought of Freud. New York: Free Press, 1984.
  • Bettlelheim, B. Freud and Man’s Soul. Knopf, 1982.
  • Cavell, M. The Psychoanalytic Mind: From Freud to Philosophy. Harvard University Press, 1993.
  • Cavell, M. Becoming a Subject: Reflections in Philosophy and Psychoanalysis. New York:  Oxford University Press, 2006.
  • Chessick, R.D. Freud Teaches Psychotherapy. Hackett Publishing Company, 1980.
  • Cioffi, F. (ed.) Freud: Modern Judgements. Macmillan, 1973.
  • Deigh, J. The Sources of Moral Agency: Essays in Moral Psychology and Freudian Theory. Cambridge, UK: Cambridge University Press, 1996.
  • Dilman, I. Freud and Human Nature. Blackwell, 1983
  • Dilman, I. Freud and the Mind. Blackwell, 1984.
  • Edelson, M. Hypothesis and Evidence in Psychoanalysis. University of Chicago Press, 1984.
  • Erwin, E. A Final Accounting: Philosophical and Empirical Issues in Freudian Psychology. MIT Press, 1996.
  • Fancher, R. Psychoanalytic Psychology: The Development of Freud’s Thought. Norton, 1973.
  • Farrell, B.A. The Standing of Psychoanalysis. Oxford University Press, 1981.
  • Fingarette, H. The Self in Transformation: Psychoanalysis, Philosophy, and the Life of the Spirit. HarperCollins, 1977.
  • Freeman, L. The Story of Anna O.–The Woman who led Freud to Psychoanalysis. Paragon House, 1990.
  • Frosh, S. The Politics of Psychoanalysis: An Introduction to Freudian and Post-Freudian Theory. Yale University Press, 1987.
  • Gardner, S. Irrationality and the Philosophy of Psychoanalysis. Cambridge, Cambridge University Press, 1993.
  • Grünbaum, A. The Foundations of Psychoanalysis: A Philosophical Critique. University of California Press, 1984.
  • Gay, V.P. Freud on Sublimation: Reconsiderations. Albany, NY: State University Press, 1992.
  • Hook, S. (ed.) Psychoanalysis, Scientific Method, and Philosophy. New York University Press, 1959.
  • Jones, E. Sigmund Freud: Life and Work (3 vols), Basic Books, 1953-1957.
  • Klein, G.S. Psychoanalytic Theory: An Exploration of Essentials. International Universities Press, 1976.
  • Lear, J. Love and Its Place in Nature: A Philosophical Interpretation of Freudian Psychoanalysis. Farrar, Straus & Giroux, 1990.
  • Lear, J. Open Minded: Working Out the Logic of the Soul. Cambridge, Harvard University Press, 1998.
  • Lear, Jonathan. Happiness, Death, and the Remainder of Life. Harvard University Press, 2000.
  • Lear, Jonathan. Freud. Routledge, 2005.
  • Levine, M.P. (ed). The Analytic Freud: Philosophy and Psychoanalysis. London: Routledge, 2000.
  • Levy, D. Freud Among the Philosophers: The Psychoanalytic Unconscious and Its Philosophical Critics. New Haven, CT: Yale University Press, 1996.
  • MacIntyre, A.C. The Unconscious: A Conceptual Analysis. Routledge & Kegan Paul, 1958.
  • Mahony, P.J. Freud’s Dora: A Psychoanalytic, Historical and Textual Study. Yale University Press, 1996.
  • Masson, J. The Assault on Truth: Freud’s Suppression of the Seduction Theory. Faber & Faber, 1984.
  • Neu, J. (ed). The Cambridge Companion to Freud. Cambridge          University Press, 1994.
  • O’Neill, J. (ed). Freud and the Passions. Pennsylvania State University Press, 2004.
  • Popper, K. The Logic of Scientific Discovery. Hutchinson, 1959.
  • Pendergast, M. Victims of Memory. HarperCollins, 1997.
  • Reiser, M. Mind, Brain, Body: Towards a Convergence of Psychoanalysis and Neurobiology. Basic Books, 1984.
  • Ricoeur, P. Freud and Philosophy: An Essay in Interpretation (trans. D. Savage). Yale University Press, 1970.
  • Robinson, P. Freud and His Critics. Berkeley, University of California Press, 1993.
  • Rose, J. On Not Being Able to Sleep: Psychoanalysis and the Modern World. Princeton University Press, 2003.
  • Roth, P. The Superego. Icon Books, 2001.
  • Rudnytsky, P.L. Freud and Oedipus. Columbia University Press, 1987.
  • Said, E.W. Freud and the Non-European. Verso (in association with the Freud Museum, London), 2003.
  • Schafer, R. A New Language for Psychoanalysis. Yale University Press, 1976.
  • Sherwood, M. The Logic of Explanation in Psychoanalysis. Academic Press, 1969.
  • Smith, D.L. Freud’s Philosophy of the Unconscious. Kluwer, 1999.
  • Stewart, W. Psychoanalysis: The First Ten Years, 1888-1898. Macmillan, 1969.
  • Sulloway, F. Freud, Biologist of the Mind. Basic Books, 1979.
  • Thornton, E.M. Freud and Cocaine: The Freudian Fallacy. Blond & Briggs, 1983.
  • Tauber, A.I. Freud, the Reluctant Philosopher. Princeton University Press, 2010.
  • Wallace, E.R. Freud and Anthropology: A History and Reappraisal. International Universities Press, 1983.
  • Wallwork, E. Psychoanalysis and Ethics. Yale University Press, 1991.
  • Whitebrook, J. Perversion and Utopia: A Study in Psychoanalysis and Critical Theory. MIT Press, 1995.
  • Whyte, L.L. The Unconscious Before Freud. Basic Books, 1960.
  • Wollheim, R. Freud. Fontana, 1971.
  • Wollheim, R. (ed.) Freud: A Collection of Critical Essays. Anchor, 1974.
  • Wollheim, R. & Hopkins, J. (eds.) Philosophical Essays on Freud. Cambridge University Press, 1982.

See also the articles on Descartes' Mind-Body DistinctionHigher-Order Theories of Consciousness and Introspection.

Author Information

Stephen P. Thornton
University of Limerick

Elizabeth Cady Stanton (1815—1902)

StantonElizabeth Cady Stanton was one of the most influential public figures in nineteenth-century America. She was one of the nation’s first feminist theorists and certainly one of its most productive activists. She was in the tradition of Abigail Adams, who implored her husband John to “remember the ladies” as he helped form the new American nation. Along with Susan B. Anthony, Stanton fueled the movement for women’s suffrage. She advocated for change in both the public and private lives of women–regarding property rights, equal education, employment opportunity, more liberal divorce provisions, and child custody rights. By addressing such a wide range of women’s issues, she laid down the foundation for the three main branches of feminism that are in existence today: Liberal feminism, which focuses on women’s similarities to men and emphasizes equality; cultural feminism, which celebrates women’s differences from men and aims for gender equity; and dominance feminism, which focuses on male power / female submission and aims to overturn all forms of gender hierarchy.

Stanton was motivated by liberal humanist ideals of egalitarianism and individual autonomy, which were an outgrowth of the Enlightenment. She was familiar with the philosophical thinkers whose works and ideas were discussed among American intellectuals at the time: Jean-Jacques Rousseau, Immanuel Kant, Mary Wollstonecraft, Johann Wolfgang Goethe, Alexis de Tocqueville, and later John Stuart Mill and Harriet Taylor Mill. Stanton’s writings and speeches demonstrate this. In addition, her years of studying and bantering with the apprentices in her father’s law office ensured that she was acquainted with the works of English legal theorists Edward Coke, William Blackstone, and Jeremy Bentham, as well as with those of her father’s influential colleagues, Joseph Story and James Kent.

Although she was theoretically minded, Stanton had no interest in living the life of an intellectual, removed from the hubbub of social and political life. In fact, her feminist theory grew out of the real-life problems women faced in her age and was developed to solve them. This places her squarely in the American tradition established by Benjamin Franklin, of developing philosophical thought that can be applied to everyday life. Stanton, then, could be termed an applied philosopher or a philosopher-practitioner. She did not seek out theory for theory’s sake, but instead put theory into practice for the purpose of improving social and political life.

Table of Contents

  1. Early Life and Education
  2. Marriage and Family in an Activist World
  3. Women’s Rights Activism
  4. Writings and Influence
    1. The Woman’s Bible
  5. Conclusion
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Works by Elizabeth Cady Stanton
    2. Biographical and Historical Works Relating to Elizabeth Cady Stanton
    3. Papers and Articles Relating to Daniel Cady

1. Early Life and Education

Elizabeth Cady, the third surviving child and second of the five daughters of Margaret (formerly Livingston) and Daniel Cady (1773-1859), was born November 12, 1815, in Johnstown, New York. Her mother was from a well-to-do family with ties to the American Revolution. Margaret Livingston’s father had been a colonel in the Continental Army, assisting in the capture of John Andre, one of Benedict Arnold’s co-conspirators. Daniel Cady was a prominent lawyer and politician in the state of New York. He became a member of the New York State Assembly (1808-13), held office as a member of Congress (1815-17), and served on the New York Supreme Court (1847-54).

From a young age, Elizabeth was keenly aware of the gender-based power imbalances that were in place in her day. With bitterness, she later recounted the many times her father responded to her aspirations and achievements by declaiming that she should have been born a boy. After the death of her older brother, the only boy in the family to have reached adulthood, she resolved to do her best to fill the void his death left in her father’s life. She learned to play chess and ride a horse. She studied Greek with the family’s minister, the Rev. Simon Hosack. She entered Johnstown Academy and won prizes and awards. Though still unable to please and impress her father to her satisfaction, these moments clearly motivated her to achieve. In all likelihood, Daniel Cady was not quite as indifferent to his daughter’s achievements, nor as hostile to feminism as her memoir sometimes suggests. His laments that she was not a boy were perhaps more a recognition of the social constraints she would face as a grown woman than an expression of his own need for a son.

When Elizabeth was a child, she overheard a conversation her father had with a woman, a  would-be client for whom the law provided no remedy. She voiced her dismay to her father, and this is the counsel he gave her: “When you are grown up, and able to prepare a speech, you must go down to Albany and talk to the legislators; tell them all you have seen in this office–the sufferings of these Scotchwomen . . . if you can persuade them to pass new laws, the old ones will be a dead letter” (Eighty Years, pp. 31-32). Prior to their conversation, young Elizabeth’s plan had been to destroy all the laws that were unjust to women by cutting them out of his law books! His advice gave her an alternative and foreshadowed the career she would make for herself as a reformer.

Born into a world of wealth and privilege, Elizabeth benefited from a better education than most girls were granted in her day. After attending Johnstown Academy, she entered the Troy Female Seminary. She felt it unjust that she was barred from attending the more academically rigorous Union College, then an all-male institution. While she gained greater understanding of women and feminine culture at Troy, overall her experience there convinced her that male-female co-education is superior to single-sex education. Seeing and visiting with men was such a novelty at Troy that it created an almost unnatural obsession with the other sex. In Elizabeth’s view it also exaggerated any differences between the genders and intensified the deficiencies of each.

Elizabeth did not complete a degree at Troy. In part this was because of the influence of the evangelist Charles Finney, a pivotal regional figure in America’s “Second Great Awakening”. Attendance at Finney’s revival sessions was mandatory at Troy, and several of her classmates were readily converted by his “fire and brimstone” sermons. Yet his preaching left Elizabeth terrified and perplexed. She considered his calls to give her heart to Jesus irrational, if not incomprehensible, and she refused to repent. Even so, she was still disturbed by the images of hell and damnation Finney had planted in her mind. Her parents, like many traditional Protestants, rejected the heightened emotionalism of Finney’s evangelical fervor and allowed her to withdraw from Troy. They treated her to a retreat in Niagara where all talk of religion was forbidden, so that she could settle herself and regain her spiritual bearings. After this exposure to Protestant revivalism, Elizabeth remained a religious skeptic for the rest of her life.

Elizabeth continued to study on her own after her time at Troy Seminary. She read the moral philosophy of George Combe and discussed the novels of Sir Walter Scott, James Fenimore Cooper, and Charles Dickens with her brother-in-law Edward Bayard. She also spent time with her intellectual and reform-minded cousins in nearby Peterboro, New York. These were the children of her mother’s sister Elizabeth (Livingston) and her husband Peter Smith.

In the Smith household, Elizabeth was exposed to a number of new people as well as to new social and political ideas. Her aunt and uncle were egalitarians not only in the ideal, but in the everyday, sense. Their home was open to African Americans on their way to freedom in Canada as well as to Oneida Indians they had befriended. It also teemed with activists and intellectuals who discussed, debated and strategized about the social and political events of the day–chief among them abolition. Her uncle, Peter Smith, was a staunch advocate of racial equality who sought an end to American slavery. Her cousin Gerrit Smith followed closely in his father’s footsteps. Gerrit and his friends in the abolition movement would not only influence Elizabeth, but introduce lifelong challenges as she and other social reformers sought to bring full equality to all people, regardless of color, creed, or gender.

2. Marriage and Family in an Activist World

It was at the home of her cousin, Gerrit Smith, that Elizabeth Cady met Henry Stanton, a man ten years her senior. He was already an extremely prominent and influential abolitionist orator. Beginning his career as a journalist, Stanton met Theodore Weld while attending the Rochester Manual Labor Institute and Weld was touring the country to learn more about manual labor schools. Both were compelling public speakers. Both were committed to social and political reform. And both had been influenced by Charles Finney. In Rochester, Stanton first met Finney when he was serving as replacement pastor at a local church. Like Weld–and in stark contrast to his future wife–Stanton was thoroughly impressed by Finney as an orator and theological thinker. In contrast to Elizabeth Cady’s response, the excesses of Finney’s fire and brimstone approach were of no concern to Stanton. He was simply full of awe and admiration for the man.

Stanton and Weld became lifelong friends, and at Weld’s behest, Stanton began attending the newly-established Lane Theological Seminary in 1832. Lane was based on the manual labor model and initially was a great success. In 1834 however, a student-sponsored debate over slavery raised the ire of the institution’s board of trustees, and a gag order was issued:  Henceforth, no events related to political issues were to be held without prior approval from the board. Nearly half the students at the seminary–Stanton and Weld among them–withdrew from the institution in protest. Stanton then began working alongside Weld, first as an agent of the American Anti-Slavery Society, then as an officer of the organization. Studying law under Daniel Cady after he and Elizabeth married, Henry then became a lawyer and a political operative. He aspired to hold office himself, and succeeded in doing so for a short time in the early 1850s. However, he was mostly known as an orator, a social/political activist, and a journalist, writing for the Anti-Slavery Standard, The Liberator, The New York Tribune, and The New York Sun.

In the 1830s, Stanton was a frequent visitor to the Smith household and a chief contributor to their many discussions about social and political issues. When Elizabeth and Stanton met in 1839, she was under the illusion that he was already married. So her earliest interactions with him were as simply an acquaintance who shared his interest in abolition, not as a potential love interest. Once the two discovered the misunderstanding, they began courting against the wishes of Elizabeth’s father. Daniel Cady was no more fond of abolitionism than he was of social reformers in general, and Stanton’s personal cause with Cady was not helped by his questionable financial viability.

After succumbing to family pressure and breaking her engagement to Stanton, Elizabeth had a change of heart, and the two married hastily in May 1840. They then went to London, where Henry was due to serve as a delegate at the World Antislavery Convention. Well-known within women’s rights history is the fact that none of the female delegates at the meeting were allowed to take a seat on the convention floor, but were segregated behind a screen in the balcony. This enraged Elizabeth as well as other American women present, such as Lucretia Mott, Abby Southwick, and Elizabeth Neal. Significantly, Henry gave a speech in favor of full participation by the women present, but his support stopped there. He did not join William Lloyd Garrison and a handful of other male delegates when they sat in the women’s section as an act of protest against such overt inequality.

Henry Stanton’s moderate support of women’s rights in London signaled an ongoing point of disconnect between Elizabeth and her husband. His passion was for abolition. The suffragists and feminists argued that women needed more social and political freedom than they currently had. For Henry, however, the plight of slaves held in bondage, abused, oppressed, and murdered at their masters’ whim was a far greater concern than women’s liberty to fill out a ballot or to hold office. Elizabeth’s passion was for women’s rights. Certainly American slavery was cruel and unjust, but the system of oppression that permitted it was the same system that allowed men to rule over women with arbitrary and capricious authority. A woman who was married to a kind and egalitarian man was simply lucky. The legal system still maintained the power of all men over their wives, no matter how cruel and unkind they may be.

Biographers have debated whether Henry was truly an advocate of Elizabeth’s quest for women’s rights, merely moderately supportive, or actually antagonistic to both her quest and her stature as a suffragist. Like both Henry Blackwell and Theodore Weld, Stanton accepted Elizabeth’s decision to excise the word “obey” from the vows she spoke at their wedding. The minister performing the ceremony was troubled by this detour from convention, and Elizabeth was convinced that the lengthy prayer he offered after the ceremony–lasting nearly an hour–was payback for this crucial omission from their marriage vows. There is no evidence that the matter troubled her husband. Even so, others in their reform-minded circles went further to advance equality in marriage. Theodore Weld, who wed the feminist and abolitionist Angelina Grimke in 1838, vowed to treat his wife as an equal partner in their marriage. Marrying in 1855, Henry Blackwell went much further, denouncing marriage as an institution that enforced male dominance over women. In addition, Blackwell accepted Lucy Stone’s decision to keep her own surname after marriage, the first woman on record in America to have done so. Other male reformers supported or worked alongside their wives in the suffrage struggle. For example, Henry Blackwell spoke on behalf of women’s suffrage and essentially co-edited The Woman’s Journal with Stone. Clearly, Henry Stanton did not match this level of commitment to his wife’s suffrage work.

Yet the level of support that Henry Stanton gave to Elizabeth’s work as a women’s rights advocate must also be measured by the standard set by her father. Daniel Cady repeatedly lamented the fact that Elizabeth was female because he believed her intellect and forceful personality would go to waste in a woman. Women in the world they lived in were meant to attend to the hearth and home, not to go out into the world to become intellectuals or, worse still, rabble-rousing activists. At the same time, her father was not completely unmoved by seeing Elizabeth act on her convictions. After she read one of her upcoming women’s rights speeches to him, he asked if she–a woman of position, privilege, and relative power–genuinely believed that she was at a disadvantage as a woman. When Elizabeth responded by reminding him of all the laws that privileged men and harmed women, her father turned to his law books to provide her with another example that would help further illustrate her point. While never more than outwardly lukewarm to her feminist efforts, Daniel Cady often provided support in this way–giving her legal ammunition to use in her writings and speeches.

Elizabeth was accustomed to receiving only the dimmest signs of approval from her father. So as an adult, she neither expected nor needed the motivation of resounding applause for her suffrage work from Henry Stanton. She had found her calling as a women’s rights advocate, and though she was a formidable force at the podium, Henry was always able to write to his “Dear Lizzie” when the two were apart. Though not a proponent of women’s rights himself, he does not appear to have been hostile to her leadership role in the women’s movement. It simply seems that, like her father, he found it difficult to fully comprehend Elizabeth’s passion for women’s rights when he saw her as a woman of considerable privilege. Because both Elizabeth and Henry were fairly protective of their private life together, it may be impossible to know for certain how each felt about the other’s reform work. Each seems to have been impressed by the other’s achievements in their chosen reform efforts, though neither was exactly a cheerleader for the other’s cause.

After the London antislavery convention, Elizabeth and Henry toured Europe for six months, returning home in the winter and settling with Elizabeth’s parents. During this period, Henry studied law under Daniel Cady, before taking up a position in Boston in 1843. In Boston Elizabeth met prominent reformers and intellectuals, among them Lydia Maria Child, Frederick Douglass, Ralph Waldo Emerson, Margaret Fuller, Nathaniel Hawthorne, Robert Lowell, Abby Kelly, Elizabeth Palmer Peabody, John Greenleaf Whittier, and Paulina Wright. She regularly listened to the sermons of the radical Unitarian and abolitionist minister, Theodore Parker, and was eager to attend the “conversations” of Amos Bronson Alcott and Margaret Fuller. She also visited the utopian Brook Farm community, admiring its idealism, though not the spartan way of life of its inhabitants.

Elizabeth loved Boston, and the art, culture, and intellectual life it had to offer. The loss of all this made the adjustment to rural life difficult for her when, in 1847, the couple moved to Seneca Falls in upstate New York. But with a house generously provided by Daniel Cady for his daughter’s growing family, there was really no way the couple could refuse. By 1847 they had three children, and there would be more–each named in honor of a beloved family member or friend: David Cady (born 1842), Henry Brewster (1844), Gerrit Smith (1845), Theodore Weld (1851), Margaret Livingston (1852), Harriot Eaton (1856) and Robert Livingston (1859).

3. Women’s Rights Activism

Elizabeth Cady Stanton became acquainted with women’s rights activists for the first time at the antislavery convention in London. Women’s abilities, achievements, and rights had been of concern to her since her youth, when she bantered with boys at Johnstown Academy and with the young men apprenticing at her father’s law office. Yet it was her experience as a housewife in Seneca Falls that prompted her to take action on behalf of women’s rights.

In her earliest years as a wife and mother, Cady Stanton found fulfillment in managing a household. In fact, she thrived on the day-to-day challenge to do so with order and efficiency. After a time, the novelty had worn off, and she found housework mundane and depressing. She also found herself sympathizing with everyday women who did not have the same access to power and privilege that she had. Assisting victims of domestic abuse in the area on several occasions, Cady Stanton saw how the same unjust laws that she had intuitively resented and wanted to change as a child were especially burdensome to women without means. Just at this point in her life, an invitation for a visit came from Lucretia Mott, who was only eight miles away in Waterloo. Cady Stanton eagerly took the trip to meet with Mott and other reformers in the community, and the idea was born to hold a convention to discuss women’s rights. In one afternoon, the group planned and announced the two-day meeting, the first of its kind. It was to be held only five days later. The event was a success that far exceeded the expectations of Cady Stanton and her convention co-planners. While a group of about fifty devoted social reformers from nearby Rochester and Syracuse were expected to participate, over two hundred people attended. Nearly seventy signed the Declaration of Sentiments, which Cady Stanton had authored, modeling it after the American Declaration of Independence.

The Seneca Falls Women’s Rights Convention was followed a month later by another such meeting in Rochester, thus setting in motion a tradition that was to shape the nineteenth century women’s movement. Conventions to discuss women’s rights were held annually between 1850 and 1860, with Elizabeth Cady Stanton and her good friend and colleague, Susan B. Anthony, playing complementary roles. Anthony was the strategist, tactician, and all-round logistics coordinator. Cady Stanton was the philosophical thinker, writer, and theoretician. Anthony sometimes chastised Cady Stanton for letting family obligations, namely childrearing, get in the way of her women’s rights work. At the same time, however, she was known to Elizabeth’s children as “Aunt Susan”.  After they had turned seven they often went on extended visits to Anthony’s home in Rochester, a landmark in their lives later described with awe and wonder.

A network of countless brilliant and talented women worked to advance women’s rights in nineteenth-century America, among them Amelia Bloomer, Olympia Brown, Paulina Wright Davis, Abby Foster, Matilda Joslyn Gage, Frances Watkins Harper, Isabella Beecher Hooker, Julia Ward Howe, Mary Ashton Rice Livermore, Lucreita Mott, Ernestine Rose, Caroline Severance, Anna Howard Shaw, Lucy Stone, Sojourner Truth, Frances Willard and Victoria Woodhull. The lifelong friendship of two of them, Elizabeth Cady Stanton and Susan B. Anthony, makes for a unique and compelling story. On the surface, the two could not have been more different. Cady Stanton was born of privilege, had a forceful and sometimes challenging personality, was fond of luxury, was a religious skeptic, and refused to believe that women had to choose between motherhood and public activism. Anthony was not born into wealth, had a quiet and calm demeanor, eschewed self-indulgence, was a devout Quaker who later converted to Unitarianism, and felt strongly that domesticity seriously compromised women’s participation in public life. But for some reason, the contrasts between Cady Stanton and Anthony served to complement, rather than to compete with, each other. Anthony had a room in Cady Stanton’s home where she was welcome to stay at any time. When Cady Stanton was unable to attend a convention, Anthony would often read the speech Elizabeth had written. Writing with eloquence, Cady Stanton could pen an essay or speech with ease, an ability that Anthony greatly admired.

While the relationship between Stanton and Anthony remained stable, the movement they were part of was not always placid. During the Civil War, suffrage leaders agreed to focus on supporting the war effort, forming the Women’s Loyal League. Once the war had ended and slavery had been abolished, Stanton and Anthony joined Frederick Douglass and others to form the American Equal Suffrage Association. This organization was devoted to securing voting rights for newly-freed African Americans and for all women simultaneously. However, when the fifteenth amendment to the Constitution was being ratified without the word “sex” included in the text, the branch of the women’s suffrage movement that was led by Stanton and Anthony was outraged. The text read: “The right of citizens of the United States to vote shall not be denied or abridged by the United States or by any state on account of race, color, or previous condition of servitude”. It was inconceivable to Stanton and her colleagues that their male advocates had failed to bring women along in the struggle for voting rights. In response Stanton and her white female colleagues made arguments on behalf of women that today smack of elitism, if not outright racism. How, they asked, could persons who were uneducated and lacking autonomy while held for years in bondage be given the right to vote when well-educated and “cultured” white women continued to be treated like children at best, chattel at worst? In their anger, they allied themselves with race-baiters in the months prior to the amendment’s passage. Stanton, Anthony, and others felt strongly that any change to the constitution involving voting rights simply must be universal–it must include African American males and females, as well as white women and others who did not yet hold the franchise. Yet clearly the pair of activists were willing to turn a blind eye to the ways in which their arguments fueled the fires of race-hate across the nation.

The race issue contributed to a schism in the women’s movement that would last for two decades. Some women, led by Lucy Stone and joined by Julia Ward Howe and Caroline Severance, formed a new organization based in Boston, the American Woman’s Suffrage Association. The AWSA ultimately endorsed the amendment giving only African American males the vote, believing that their good will and co-operative spirit would be rewarded in time. Unfortunately the NWSA and the AWSA had to struggle to distinguish themselves from each other to the rank and file of women’s rights supporters. They printed rival publications to promote women’s rights from the perspective of the leaders of each organization. Stanton and Anthony published The Revolution (1868-1872) and Stone The Woman’s Journal (1870-1917). They also competed for members and political support. It was not until 1890 that the divided movement reunited and was renamed the National American Suffrage Association, continuing the voting rights struggle for another thirty years.

4. Writings and Influence

As noted, Elizabeth Cady Stanton was an eloquent and prolific writer. While she served as the philosopher of the suffrage movement, Susan B. Anthony served as its strategist. Historians have noted that their respective strengths complemented each other. Equally significant is the different approaches they took to securing rights for women. Anthony was single-minded in her quest for the vote as the stepping stone that would provide women access to all other rights. If only women could vote and hold public office, they would then be able to self-advocate: Women could vote for candidates with policies that empower and support women and their families. They could press for changes to laws related to marriage, divorce, and custody for children. Women could help enact any number of provisions that would give them more power and influence in society. If only they had the vote.

Stanton also believed in the power of voting rights, but she also saw no reason not to carry on the battle for women’s equality on all fronts at once. Women had needed property rights when legislatures began to pass them in the 1830s and ‘40s. They continued to need and deserve other rights related to property and financial self-determination in the 1860s, ‘70s, and ‘80s, and Stanton spoke out about how and why these rights should be granted. Similarly, laws dealing with the most intimate aspects of women’s lives–marriage, divorce, and child custody–merited attention in Stanton’s “here and now,” not at some future time when women would hold the power of the franchise.

Stanton’s published works addressed four main areas of feminist concern:  personal/social freedom, marriage/family matters, legal/political rights and religion’s role and influence. Chief among the social constraints that restricted women’s freedom in Stanton’s day was access to education. She began discussing this subject early in her work as a reformer. Prohibitions against rigorous academic training for girls and women thwarted their intellectual growth and thus the levels of personal and social development they could achieve. The tradition of single-sex education further exacerbated this problem. The respective weaknesses of men and women (which Stanton believed were not natural to each gender but nurtured by social norms and values) were reinforced when they were deprived of interaction. This perpetuated the imbalance of power based on gender. The inferior education women received when Stanton began her work also had the potential to contribute to women’s moral inferiority. Without properly exercising their intellectual powers and being challenged to make difficult academic and moral distinctions, women were unable to function as independent decision-makers. This harmed not only women as individuals, but also the social institutions they are a part of: The family, the local community, and the state. In this sense, Stanton laid the foundation for what would later be called liberal feminism, a school of feminist thought which maintains that women are more similar to men than they are different from them. Thus, it aims for equal treatment of men and women, particularly in matters related to education, employment, pay equity and political participation.

Stanton was among the more bold women’s rights advocates in her era in that she took on issues relating to marriage that other suffragists considered off-limits. She and Anthony both referred to the institution of marriage as it existed in their time as “male marriage”, that is, a civil union made for and by men, which was used to perpetuate male power and authority. Among the most controversial was divorce. She was under none of the popular illusions that marriage was a blessed institution that, fairytale-like, brought out the best in people. She resented the suggestion that a virtuous and patient woman could persuade–through her love, faith or virtue–a domineering, alcoholic or abusive man to become a more kind and considerate husband. Women were only and always harmed by their relationships with such men in Stanton’s view. Their own moral character was compromised, as was the overall moral tone of their home and family. Speaking in favor of pending legislation in New York that would liberalize divorce policies, Stanton said that rather than prevent a woman from leaving an abusive and alcoholic husband, the law should prohibit such men from getting married. Such a policy would go much farther toward protecting the institution of marriage than the laws that prevailed in the day were able to do. Here we see in Stanton’s thought a kernel of what would later become dominance feminism. This is a branch of feminist thought that focuses on the differences between men and women. It concludes that, whether natural or socially constructed, gender distinctions are used to reinforce male dominance and female submission. Like Stanton, today’s dominance feminists are concerned with marriage and divorce. They also venture into territory that Stanton and her contemporaries only dared to hint at in the age of Victorian propriety: Domestic violence, rape, incest, pornography, and prostitution. The aim of dominance feminism is to overturn the male power structure that makes these abuses of women possible.

Stanton’s discussion of the legal and political rights of women is the best known within popular discussions of women’s history today. Women’s right to participate fully in public, political life was certainly of paramount importance to her. Over and over in her lectures and essays, Stanton emphasized the ways in which men’s dominance in public life disabled and disgraced women. With men as the chief arbiters of legal and political right, women were rendered “civilly dead” as Stanton so eloquently termed it at the Seneca Falls convention. Women were powerless to stop their husbands if they chose to squander the family’s resources, even if the source of those resources was the savings or inheritance that women themselves had brought into their households. Men made all the laws regarding education, employment, marriage, divorce, child custody, property, inheritance, breaches of the civil and the criminal codes–every aspect of life that could and did affect women’s lives, but over which women were powerless to effect change. Men thus became like monarchs ruling over all classes of society, who could readily wield tyrannical force, if they willed to do so. All the other social inequalities that concerned Stanton trickled down from this one arena–that of legal and political rights.

Significantly, when Stanton spoke in favor of universal suffrage–that is, of extending voting rights to not only all African American males but also to all women–after the Civil War, she cautioned against maintaining distinctions among the various classes of people in society. The entire class of African Americans held in slavery had been prohibited from voting since the founding of the country. As legislators considered extending the franchise, Stanton implored them to erase all similar social distinctions. Women should no longer be treated as a separate class of individuals who are prohibited from voting any more than newly freed African Americans should. On American soil, Stanton said, all citizens were to be granted equal consideration in this way.

This stance, too, created some friction for Stanton as the post-Civil War discourse on voting rights got underway. She and Anthony were absolutely unyielding in their call for women’s full political equality. While other suffragists, like Lucy Stone, were willing to consider partial suffrage, which would allow women to vote on local issues of concern to them, like education or municipal budgets, Stanton and Anthony held firm: Women are equal in all ways to men and should be treated as such. At times they displayed their own class biases on this point. Why should an ignorant and uneducated man of any race be granted the right to vote in all matters when well-educated and cultured women were allowed to vote only about matters like school policies and local road construction? Most critically, as the post-War discussion advanced and feminists were being urged to accept this as “the Negro’s hour” (as Frederick Douglass so famously put it), Lucy Stone and others were willing to surrender women’s voting rights for the time being to appease their allies in Congress. Stone and others assumed the discussion of women’s voting rights would be resumed in a timely fashion, but they believed that, for the peace of the nation, they needed to step aside temporarily. Stanton and Anthony saw the writing on the wall, as such, and held to insisting on female suffrage until the very last legislators had cast their vote. Ultimately, the controversy over universal suffrage resulted in the schism between Stone and her camp and the Stanton-Anthony coalition discussed above.

a. The Woman’s Bible


Stanton had always been critical of the ways in which the Christian churches contributed to women’s oppression, but she addressed this topic head-on in the last decade of her life. In publishing The Woman’s Bible, Stanton was far ahead of the feminist curve. Biblical criticism of any sort was relatively new, having been initiated in mid-nineteenth-century Germany by thinkers like Johann Gottfried Eichhorn (1752–1827), Wilhelm Martin Leberecht de Wette (1780–1849) and Julius Wellhausen (1844–1918). The idea of a largely secular examination of the Bible that investigated its implications, flaws and shortcomings as related to women was virtually unthought of.

The Woman’s Bible consists of a collection of essays by a committee of women intellectuals on passages of the Judeo-Christian scriptures that discuss women. Stanton and her colleagues took a critical approach to the story of Eve in the Garden of Eden, for instance. First of all, the story is deemed an allegory, not a factual account. Darwin’s theory of evolution provides us with a more plausible account of the development of human beings over time, not in one act of creation. Secondly, Eve is praised, rather than blamed, for taking the fruit, because this act demonstrates her thirst for knowledge. As one contributor stated it, “Fearless of death if she can gain wisdom [she] takes of the fruit” (The Woman’s Bible, p. 26). The work takes a similar realist approach to the story of Jesus’ life. Cady Stanton and her contributors readily write about him as a man, not as God nor even as God’s Son. Stanton’s view on the miracles he performed is that human development is such that any human being could perform miracles, if only they have the will to make themselves as pure and good as Jesus was.

Other passages, such as those that recount the marriages of the patriarchs, are discussed so as to reify ideals of marital love. In both the Old and New Testament passages, Stanton and her contributors highlight and heighten the role of the women in question. They put particular emphasis on Miriam’s role in the quest for Jewish freedom, for instance. They also discuss the important work of Deborah the judge, as well as of female disciples in the early Christian church, noting that they were committed to their cause and were conveyors of God’s word. In this sense, Stanton sowed the seed of cultural feminism–the ideal that women bring a special perspective and set of values to their participation in society. Therefore they bring a special set of values that needs to be recognized, understood, and appreciated.

The overall objective of The Woman’s Bible was to use textual analysis and historical criticism to dismantle the traditional interpretation of any one biblical passage and replace it with a feminine, if not a feminist, perspective. The effort was a success on this level. Though it went into additional printings, The Woman’s Bible brought Elizabeth Cady Stanton a great deal of criticism, more for her audacity in taking on the project than in what she actually said about the Bible or its merits.

Although Stanton’s efforts in The Woman’s Bible did not match the increasingly rigorous standards of her contemporaries in theology who were beginning their own critical examinations of the Jewish and Christian scriptures, neither did it fail as an intellectual exercise. This was simply a groundbreaking work, which called into question a number of widely accepted claims about the nature of God, God’s esteem for and relation to women, and women’s place within faith communities. It also paved the way for future work for and by women in religion in the twentieth century. Second wave feminists in the 1960s and 1970s, who were struggling for the full ordination of women in the Christian and Jewish traditions, relied heavily on this early work of early feminist criticism by Stanton. Academic women in the same era were inspired by her example and produced more modern and academically rigorous works that scrutinized sacred texts and religious traditions from a feminist perspective as well. Despite her own religious skepticism, Stanton would have been heartened to have seen a future in which over half of the students in mainstream Protestant seminaries are women, and the ordination of women is commonplace in liberal Protestant and Jewish traditions.

5. Conclusion

Certainly Elizabeth Cady Stanton had an immense amount of influence in her day; her influence and her legacy continue even if she is not always an overtly recognized source by today’s feminists. At the heart of her ideals and advocacy lies a blurring of the distinction between the “public” world of law and politics, and the “private” world of home and family–a distinction that held sway through so much of the eighteenth and nineteenth centuries. Feminists in the 1970s and ‘80s would craft a mantra of sorts that got to the heart of this distinction-blurring: “The personal is political”. Cady Stanton’s work is truly the source of such thinking. Stanton wanted the “public” realm, particularly law and politics, to be imported into the home. She wanted to bring an end to the abuse and neglect men were allowed to impose on women because the law turned a blind eye to domestic violence as a “private” matter. Other women activists of the day, such as Frances Willard the temperance activist, wanted to see women’s “private” virtues exported into the public realm: Give us access to the vote, and we will clean up the crime and corruption of the “public” political realm. Susan B. Anthony’s position represented a middle ground. She rejected the public/private distinction as much as Cady Stanton did, but she did so from a different angle and for different reasons. Access to the vote and the ability to hold public office would allow women to speak for themselves and act on their own behalf. If they are dissatisfied with the laws governing marriage and divorce, then give them voting rights and let them change such laws.

Fond of luxury and susceptible to self-indulgence all her life, Elizabeth Cady Stanton became obese late in life and suffered from maladies that were related to her overall poor health:  Fading eyesight, decreased mobility and chronic fatigue. Even so she remained active and engaged in life, and optimistic that women would indeed succeed in winning the vote in the twentieth century. At the very least she could rest knowing that she had passed on the legacy of the suffrage struggle to her daughter’s generation of women’s rights activists. Stanton’s daughter, Harriot Stanton Blatch, was a feminist activist in her own right who helped compile the six-volume History of Woman’s Suffrage, which Stanton, Anthony, Matilda Joslyn Gage and others had begun in 1881. While her daughter was able to vote for the last twenty years of her life, Elizabeth Cady Stanton was never able to register a ballot. She died October 26, 1902, in New York City, just shy of eighteen years before the passage of the nineteenth amendment.

6. References and Further Reading

a. Works by Elizabeth Cady Stanton

  • “Address of Mrs. Elizabeth Cady Stanton”, delivered at Seneca Falls and Rochester (July and August, 1848).
  • “It is so Unladylike” (1853).
  • “I Have all the Rights I Want” (1858).
  • “The Slave’s Appeal” (1860).
  • “Appeal to the Women of New York” (1860).
  • “Address of Elizabeth Cady Stanton on the Divorce Bill”, before the Judiciary Committee of the New York Senate (February 1861).
  • “Free Speech” (1861).
  • “Address in Favor of Universal Suffrage” before the Judiciary Committees of the Legislature of New York (January 1867).
  • “Marriage/Divorce” (1871).
    • A memorial for Victoria Woodhull, so later than 1871 in actuality.
  • “Woman Suffrage,” delivered to the Judiciary Committee of the House of Representatives (1890).
  • “Patriotism and chastity” (1891).
  • “Solitude of Self,” delivered to the Judiciary Committee of the United States Congress (January 1892).
  • “Suffrage, a Natural Right” (1894).
  • The Woman’s Bible (1895). New York: European Publishing Company.
  • “Bible and Church Degrade Woman” (1898).
  • Eighty Years and More (1898). New York: European Publishing Company.
  • Elizabeth Cady Stanton Papers, Rutgers University Archives.

b. Biographical and Historical Works Relating to Elizabeth Cady Stanton

  • Baker, Jean (2005). Sisters: The Lives of America’s Suffragists. New York: Hill and Wang.
  • Davis, Sue (2009). The Political Thought of Elizabeth Cady Stanton. New York: New York University Press.
  • DuBois, Ellen Carol (1981). Elizabeth Cady Stanton, Susan B. Anthony: Correspondence, Writings, Speeches. Boston: Northeastern University Press.
  • Gage, Matilda Joslyn, and others. A History of Woman Suffrage (in six volumes, 1881-1922). New York: C. Mann.
  • Ginzberg, Lori D. (2009). Elizabeth Cady Stanton: An American Life. New York: Hill and Wang.
  • Griffith, Elisabeth (1984). In Her Own Right: The Life of Elizabeth Cady Stanton. New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Matthews, Jean V. (1997). Women’s Struggle for Equality: The First Phase, 1828-1876. Lanham, MD: Ivan R. Dee Pub.
  • Stanton, Henry B. (1885). Random Recollections. New York: Harper & Bros.
  • Stanton, Theodore and Harriot Stanton Blatch (1922). Elizabeth Cady Stanton. New York: Harper & Bros.

c. Papers and Articles Relating to Daniel Cady

  • Cady, Daniel. Letters and Papers at Syracuse University Library.
    • Also includes some of Elizabeth Cady Stanton’s letters to her relatives.
  • “Retirement of Judge Daniel Cady,” New York Times (January 25, 1855).
  • “Daniel Cady”, in Biographical Directory of the United States Congress. Washington, DC: United States Government Printing Office.
  • Raymond, William (1851). “Daniel Cady,” in Biographical Sketches of Distinguished Men of Columbia County (New York). Albany, NY: Weed, Parsons, & Co.

Author Information

Dorothy Rogers
Montclair State University

Michel Foucault (1926–1984)

Michel Foucault was a major figure in two successive waves of 20th century French thought--the structuralist wave of the 1960s and then the poststructuralist wave. By the premature end of his life, Foucault had some claim to be the most prominent living intellectual in France.

Foucault’s work is transdisciplinary in nature, ranging across the concerns of the disciplines of history, sociology, psychology, and philosophy. At the first decade of the 21st century, Foucault is the author most frequently cited in the humanities in general. In the field of philosophy this is not so, despite philosophy being the primary discipline in which he was educated, and with which he ultimately identified. This relative neglect is because Foucault’s conception of philosophy, in which the study of truth is inseparable from the study of history, is thoroughly at odds with the prevailing conception of what philosophy is.

Foucault’s work can generally be characterized as philosophically oriented historical research; towards the end of his life, Foucault insisted that all his work was part of a single project of historically investigating the production of truth. What Foucault did across his major works was to attempt to produce an historical account of the formation of ideas, including philosophical ideas. Such an attempt was neither a simple progressive view of the history, seeing it as inexorably leading to our present understanding, nor a thoroughgoing historicism that insists on understanding ideas only by the immanent standards of the time. Rather, Foucault continually sought for a way of understanding the ideas that shape our present not only in terms of the historical function these ideas played, but also by tracing the changes in their function through history.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Early works on psychology
  3. Archaeology
    1. The History of Madness
    2. Writings on Art and Literature
    3. The Birth of the Clinic
    4. The Order of Things
    5. The Archaeology of Knowledge
  4. Genealogy
    1. Discipline and Punish
    2. The Will to Knowledge
    3. Lecture Series
  5. Governmentality
  6. Ethics
  7. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary
    2. Secondary

1. Life

Michel Foucault was born Paul-Michel Foucault in 1926 in Poitiers in western France. His father, Paul-André Foucault, was an eminent surgeon, who was the son of a local doctor also called Paul Foucault. Foucault’s mother, Anne, was likewise the daughter of a surgeon, and had longed to follow a medical career, but her wish had to wait until Foucault’s younger brother as such a career was not available for women at the time. It is surely no coincidence then that much of Foucault’s work would revolve around the critical interrogation of medical discourses.

Foucault was schooled in Poitiers during the years of German occupation. Foucault excelled at philosophy and, having from a young age declared his intention to pursue an academic career, persisted in defying his father, who wanted the young Paul-Michel to follow his forebears into the medical profession. The conflict with his father may have been a factor in Foucault’s dropping the 'Paul' from his name. The relationship between father and son remained cool through to the latter’s death in 1959, though Foucault remained close to his mother.

He moved to Paris in 1945, just after the end of the war, to prepare entrance examinations for the École Normale Supérieure d'Ulm, which was then (and still is) the most prestigious institution for education in the humanities in France. In this preparatory khâgne year, he was taught philosophy by the eminent French Hegelian, Jean Hyppolite. Foucault entered the École Normale in 1946, where he was taught by Maurice Merleau-Ponty and mentored by Louis Althusser. Foucault primarily studied philosophy, but also obtained qualifications in psychology. These years at the École Normale were marked by depression – and attempted suicide – which is generally agreed to have resulted from Foucault’s difficulties coming to terms with his homosexuality. While at the École Normale, Foucault also joined the French Communist Party in 1950 under the influence of Althusser, but was never active and left with Althusser’s assent thoroughly disillusioned in 1952.

Foucault aggregated in philosophy from the École Normale in 1951. The same year, he began teaching psychology there, where his students included Jacques Derrida, who would later become a philosophical antagonist of Foucault’s. Foucault also began to work as a laboratory researcher in psychology. He would continue to work in psychology in various capacities until 1955, when he took up a position as a director of the Maison de France at the University of Uppsala in Sweden. From Sweden, he moved to Poland as French cultural attaché in 1958, and then from there moved to the Institut Français in Hamburg in 1959. During these overseas postings, he wrote his first major work and primary doctoral thesis, a history of madness, which was later published in 1961. In 1960, Foucault returned to France to teach psychology in the philosophy department of the University of Clermont-Ferrand. He remained in that post until 1966, during which he lived in Paris and commuted to teach. It was in Paris in 1960 that Foucault met the militant leftist Daniel Defert, then a student and later a sociologist, with whom he would form a partnership that lasted the rest of Foucault’s life.

From 1964, Defert was posted to Tunisia for 18 months of compulsory military service, during which time Foucault visited him more than once. This led to Foucault in 1966 taking up a chair of philosophy at the University of Tunis, where he was to remain until 1968, missing the events of May 1968 in Paris for the most part. 1966 also saw the publication of Foucault's The Order of Things, which received both praise and critical remarks. It became a bestseller despite its length and the obscurity of its argumentation, and cemented Foucault as a major figure in the French intellectual firmament.

Returning to France in 1968, Foucault presided over the creation and then running of the philosophy department at the new experimental university at Vincennes in Paris. The new university was created as an answer to the student uprising of 1968, and inherited its ferment. Foucault assembled a department composed mostly of militant Marxists, including some who have gone on to be among the most prominent French philosophers of their generation: Alain Badiou, Jacques Rancière, and Étienne Balibar. After scandals related to this militancy, the department was briefly stripped of its official accreditation. Foucault was already moving on, however; he was in 1970 elected to a chair at France's most prestigious intellectual institution, the Collège de France, which he held for the rest of his life. The only duty of this post is to give an annual series of lectures based on one’s current research. At the time of writing, Foucault’s thirteen Collège lecture series are in the process of being published in their entirety: eight have appeared in French, seven have been published in English.

The early 1970s were a politically tumultuous period in Paris, where Foucault was again living. Foucault threw himself into political activism, primarily in relation to the prison system, as a founder of what was called the “Prisons Information Group.” It originated in an effort to aid political prisoners, but in fact sought to give a voice to all prisoners. In this connection, Foucault became close to Gilles Deleuze, during which friendship Foucault wrote an enthusiastic foreword to the English-language edition of Deleuze and Félix Guattari’s Anti-Oedipus, before Foucault and Deleuze fell out.

In the late ‘70s, the political climate in France cooled considerably; Foucault largely withdrew from activism and turned his hand to journalism. He covered the Iranian Revolution first-hand in newspaper dispatches as the events unfolded in 1978 and 1979. He began to spend more and more time teaching in the United States, where he had lately found an enthusiastic audience.

It was perhaps in the United States that Foucault acquired HIV. He developed AIDS in 1984 and his health quickly declined. He finished editing two volumes on ancient sexuality which were published that year from his sick-bed, before dying on the 26th June, leaving the editing of a fourth and final volume uncompleted. He bequeathed his estate to Defert, with the proviso that there were to be no posthumous publications, a testament which has been subject to ever more elastic interpretation since.

A note on dates: Where there is any disagreement among sources as to the facts of Foucault’s biography, the chronology compiled by Daniel Defert at the start of Foucault’s Dits et écrits is considered in this article to be definitive.

2. Early works on psychology

Foucault’s earliest work lacks a distinctively “Foucauldian” perspective. In these works, Foucault displays influences typical of young French academics of the time: phenomenology, psychoanalysis, and Marxism. Foucault’s primary work of this period was his first monograph, Mental Illness and Personality, published in 1954. This slim volume, commissioned for a series intended for students, begins with an historical survey of the types of explanation put forward in psychology, before producing a synthesis of perspectives from evolutionary psychology, psychoanalysis, phenomenology and Marxism. From these perspectives, mental illness can ultimately be understood as an adaptive, defensive response by an organism to conditions of alienation, which an individual experiences under capitalism. Foucault first modified the book in 1962 in a new edition, entitled Mental Illness and Psychology. This resulted in the change of the later parts – the most Marxist material and the conclusion –to bring them into line with the theoretical perspective that he had by then expounded in his later The History of Madness. According to this view, madness is something natural, and alienation is responsible not so much for creating mental illness as such, but for making madness into mental illness. This was a perspective with which Foucault in turn later grew unhappy, and he had the book go out of print for a time in France.

Foucault’s other major publication of this early period, a long introduction (much longer than the text it introduced) to the French translation of Ludwig Binswanger’s Dream and Existence, a work of Heideggerian existential psychoanalysis, appeared in the same month in 1954 as Mental Illness and Personality. Far from merely introducing Binswanger’s text, Foucault here expounds a novel account of the relation between imagination, dream and reality. He combines Binswanger’s insights with Freud’s, but arguing that neither Binswanger nor Freud understands the fundamental role of dreaming for the imagination. Since imagination is necessary to grasp reality, dreaming is also essential to existence itself. 

3. Archaeology

a. The History of Madness

Foucault’s first canonical monograph, in the sense of a work that he never repudiated, was his 1961 primary doctoral thesis, Madness and Unreason: A History of Madness in the Classical Age, which has ultimately come to be known simply as the History of Madness. It is best known in the English-speaking world by an abridged version, Madness and Civilization, since for decades the latter was the only version available in English. History of Madness is a work of some originality, showing several influences, but not slavishly following any convention. It resembles Friedrich Nietzsche’s Birth of Tragedy in style and form (thought greatly exceeding it in length), proposing a disjunction between reason and unreason similar to Nietzsche’s Apollonian/Dionysian distinction. It also bears the influence of French history and philosophy of science, the most prominent twentieth century representative of which was Gaston Bachelard, the developer of a notion of “epistemological rupture” to which most of Foucault’s works are indebted. Yet Georges Canguilhem’s focus on the division of the normal from the pathological is perhaps the most telling influence on Foucault in this book. Foucault’s thought continues moreover to owe something to Marxism and to social history more generally, constituting an historical analysis of social divisions.

The History of Madness follows logically enough from Foucault’s interest in psychology. The link is stronger even than the title indicates: much of the work is concerned with the birth of medical psychiatry, which Foucault associates with extraordinary changes in the treatment of the mad in modernity, meaning first their systematic exclusion from society in early modernity, followed by their pathologization in late modernity. The History of Madness thus sets the pattern for most of Foucault’s works by being concerned with discrete changes in a given area of social life at particular points in history. Like Foucault’s other major works of the 1960s, it fits broadly into the category of the history and philosophy of science. It has wider philosophical import than that, however, with Foucault ultimately finding that madness is negatively constitutive of Enlightenment reason via its exclusion. The exclusion of unreason itself, concomitant with the physical exclusion of the mad, is effectively the dark side of the valorization of reason in modernity. For this reason, the original main title of the work was Madness and Unreason. Foucault argues in effect for the recuperation of madness, via a valorization of philosophers and artists deemed mad, such as Nietzsche, a recuperation which Foucault thinks the works of such men already portend.

b. Writings on Art and Literature

Foucault’s writings on art and literature have received relatively little attention, even though Foucault’s work is widely influential among scholars of art and literature. This is surely because Foucault’s work directly in these areas is relatively minor and marginal in his corpus. Still, Foucault wrote several short treatments on artists, including Manet and Magritte, and more substantially on literature. In 1963, Foucault wrote a short book on the novelist Raymond Roussel, published in English as Death and the Labyrinth, which is exceptional as Foucault’s only book-length piece of literary or artistic criticism, and which Foucault himself never considered as of a similar importance to his other books of the 1960s. Still, the figure of Roussel offers something of a bridge from The History of Madness and the work that Foucault will now go on to do, not least because Roussel is a writer who could be categorized as rehabilitating madness in the literary sphere. Roussel was a madman – eccentrically suicidal – whose work consisted in playing games with language according to arbitrary rules, but with the utmost dedication and seriousness, the purpose of which was to investigate language itself, and its relation to extra-linguistic things. This latter theme is precisely that which comes to preoccupy Foucault in the 1960s, and in the form too of uncovering the rules of the production of discourse.

Despite that the Roussel book was the only one Foucault wrote on literature, he wrote literary essays throughout the 1960s. He wrote several studies of French literary intellectuals, such as the “Preface to Transgression” about the work of Georges Bataille in relation to that of the Marquis de Sade, the “Prose of Actaeon” about Pierre Klossowski,  the “Thought of the Outside” about Maurice Blanchot. These were all figures who wrote literature or wrote about it, but they were also all philosophical thinkers too, influenced by Nietzsche and/or Martin Heidegger: it was through his contemporary Blanchot, a Heideggerian, that Foucault came to Bataille, and thus to Nietzsche, who proved to be a decisive influence on Foucault’s work at multiple points. Foucault also wrote “Language to Infinity,” about de Sade and his literary influence, and a piece on Flaubert at this time. All of these works contribute to a general engagement by Foucault with the theme of language and its relation to its exterior, a theme which is explored at greater length in his contemporaneous monographs.

c. The Birth of the Clinic

The major work of 1963 for Foucault was his follow-up to his The History of Madness, entitled The Birth of the Clinic: An Archaeology of Medical Perception. The Birth of the Clinic examines the emergence of modern medicine. It follows on from the History of Madness logically enough: the analysis of the psychiatric classification of madness as disease is followed by an analysis on the emergence of modern medicine itself. However, this new study is a considerably more modest work than the other, due largely to a significant methodological tightening. The preface to The Birth of the Clinic proposes to look at discourses on their own terms as they historically occur, without the hermeneutics that attempts to interpret them in their relation to fundamental reality and historical context. That is, as Foucault puts it, to treat signifiers without reference to the signified, to look at the evolution of medical language without passing judgment on the things it supposedly referred to, namely disease.

The main body of the work is an historical study of the emergence of clinical medicine around the time of the French revolution, at which time the transformation of social institutions and political imperatives combined to produce modern institutional medicine for the first time. The leitmotif of the work is the notion of a medical “gaze”: modern medicine is a matter of attentive observation of patients, without prejudging the maladies one may find, in the service of the demographic needs of society. There is some significant tension between the methodology and the rest of the book, however, with much of what is talked about in the book clearly not being signifiers themselves. The fulfillment of the intention announced at the beginning of The Birth of the Clinic is found rather in Foucault’s next book, The Order of Things, first published in 1966.

d. The Order of Things

Subtitled “An Archaeology of the Human Sciences,” this book aims to uncover the history of what today are called the “human sciences.” This is an obscure area, in fact, certainly to English-speaking readers, who are not often used to seeing the relevant disciplines grouped in this way. The human sciences do not comprise mainstream academic disciplines; they are rather an interdisciplinary space for the reflection on the “man” who is the subject of more mainstream scientific knowledge, taken now as an object, sitting between these more conventional areas, and of course associating with disciplines such as anthropology, history, and, indeed, philosophy. Disciplines identified as “human sciences” include psychology, sociology, and the history of culture.

The mainstay of the book is not concerned with this narrow area, however, but its pre-history, in the sense of the academic discourses which preceded its very existence. In dealing with these, Foucault employs a method which is certainly similar to that of his earlier works, but is now more deliberate, namely the broad procedure of looking for what in the French philosophy of science are called “epistemic breaks.” Foucault does not use this phrase, which originated with Gaston Bachelard, but uses a resonant neologism, “episteme.” In using this term, Foucault refers to the stable ensemble of unspoken rules that governs knowledge, which is itself susceptible to historical breaks. The book tracks two major changes in the Western episteme, the first being at the beginning of the “Classical” age during the seventeenth century, and the second being at the beginning of a modern era at the turn of the nineteenth. Foucault does not concern himself here with why these shifts happen, only with what has happened. This then, is now the work that he calls “archaeology.”  In the original preface to The History of Madness, Foucault describes what he is doing as the “archaeology” of madness. This notion, used here apparently off-handedly, becomes the name of Foucault’s research project through the 1960s. In The Birth of the Clinic, Foucault once again uses the word “archaeology” only once, but this time in the subtitle itself. Only with The Order of Things is archaeology formulated as a methodology.

In The Order of Things, Foucault is concerned only to analyze the transformations in discourse as such, with no consideration of the concrete institutional context. The consideration of that context is now put aside until the 1970s. He shows that in each of the disciplines he looks at, the precursors of the contemporary discipline of biology, economics, and linguistics, the same general transformations occur at roughly the same time, encompassing myriad changes at a local level that might not seem connected to one another.

Before the Classical age, Foucault argues, Western knowledge was a rather disorganized mass of different kinds of knowledge (superstitious, religious, philosophical), with the work of science being to note all kinds of resemblances between things. With the advent of the Classical Age, clear distinctions between academic disciplines emerge, part of a general enthusiasm for categorizing information. The aim at this stage is for a total, definitive cataloguing and categorization of what can be observed. Science is concerned with superficial visibles, not looking for anything deeper. Language is understood as simply transparently representing things, such that the only concern with language is work of clarification. For the first time, however, there is an appreciation of the reflexive role of subjects in the enquiry they are conducting – the scientist is himself an object for enquiry, an individual conceived simultaneously as both subject and object. Then, from the beginning of the nineteenth century, a new attention to language emerges, and the search begins for precisely what is hidden from our view, hidden logics behind what we can see. To this tendency belong theories as diverse as the dialectical view of history, psychoanalysis, and Darwinian evolution. Foucault criticises all such thought as involving a division between what is “the Same” and what is other, with the latter usually excluded from scientific inquiry, focusing all the time on “man” as a privileged object of inquiry. Foucault ultimately argues, however, that there are signs of the end of “man” as an object of knowledge, as our thought, in the shape of the “counter-sciences” of psychoanalysis and ethnology, plumbs areas beyond what can be understood in terms of the concept of “man.” One sees, again, the valorization here of mad writers, such as Roussel and Nietzsche: the historico-philosophical thesis of The History of Madness, and its project of the recuperation of madness, is here inscribed in terms of the production of knowledge.

e. The Archaeology of Knowledge

Foucault followed the Order of Things with his Archaeology of Knowledge, which was published in 1969. In this work, Foucault tries to consolidate the method of archaeology: it is the only one of Foucault’s major works that does not comprise an historical study, and thus his most theoretical work. It is the most influential work of Foucault’s in literary criticism and some other applied areas.

Archaeology, Foucault now declares, means approaching language in a way that does not refer to a subject who transcends it – though he acknowledges he has not been rigorous enough in this respect in the past. That is not to say that Foucault is making a strong metaphysical claim about subjectivity, but rather only that he is proposing a mode of analysis that subordinates the role of the subject. Foucault in fact proposes to suspend acceptance not only of the notion of a subject who produces discourse but of all generally accepted discursive unities, such as the book. Instead, he wants to look only at the surface level of what is said, rather than to try to interpret language in terms of what stands behind it, be that hidden meaning, structures, or subjects. Foucault’s suggestion is to look at language in terms of discrete linguistic events, which he calls “statements,” such as to understand the multitudinous ways in which statements relate to one another. Foucault’s statement is not defined by content (a statement is not a proposition), nor by its simple materiality (the sounds made, the marks on paper). The specificity of a statement is rather determined both by such intrinsic properties and by its extrinsic relations, by context as well as content.

Foucault asserts the autonomy of discourse, that language has a power that cannot be reduced to other things, either to the will of a speaking subject, or to economic and social forces, for example. This is not to say that statements exist independently of extra-linguistic reality, however, or of larger “discursive formations” in which they occur. It is rather the opposite. Both these things in effect need to be factored into analyses of statements – the identity of the statement is conditioned both by its relation to other statements, to discourse as such, and to reality, as well as by its intrinsic form. The statement is governed by a “system of its functioning,” which Foucault calls the “archive.” Archaeology is now interpreted as the excavation of the archive. This of course retroactively includes much of what Foucault has been doing all along.

Foucault followed this work with his celebrated 1969 essay, “What is an Author?” (somewhat confusingly because many versions of this circulate, including multiple translations of the original, and Foucault’s own translation, was delivered in English many years later), which effectively concludes the series of Foucault’s writings on literature in the 1960s. This work represents an extension in literary theory of the impulse behind the Archaeology, with Foucault systematically criticizing the notion of an author, and suggesting that we can move beyond ascribing transcendent sovereignty to the subject in our understanding of discourse, understanding the subject rather as a function of discourse.

4. Genealogy

The period after May 1968 saw considerable social upheaval in France, particularly in the universities, where the revolt of that month had begun. Foucault, returning to this atmosphere from a Tunis that was also in political ferment, was politicized.

His work quickly reflected his new engagement (the Archaeology was completed early in 1968, though published the next year). His inaugural lecture at the Collège de France in 1970, published in French as The Order of Discourse (L’ordre du discours – it is available in diverse anthologized English translations under various titles, including as an appendix to the American edition of The Archaeology of Knowledge), represented an attempt to move the analysis of discourse that had preoccupied him through the 1960s onto a more political terrain, asking questions now about the institutional production of discourse. Here, Foucault announces a new project, which he designates “genealogy,” though Foucault never repudiates the archaeological method as such.

“Genealogy” implies doing what Foucault calls the “history of the present.” A genealogy is an explanation of where we have come from: while Foucault’s genealogies stop well before the present, their purpose is to tell us how our current situation originated, and is motivated by contemporary concerns. Of course, one may argue that all history has these features, but with genealogy this is intended rather than a matter of unavoidable bias. Some of Foucault’s archaeologies can be said to have had similar features, but their purpose was to look at epistemic shifts discretely, in themselves, without insisting on this practical relevance. The word “genealogy” is drawn directly from Nietzsche’s Genealogy of Morals: genealogy is a Nietzschean form of history, though rather more meticulously historical than anything Nietzsche ever attempted.

a. Discipline and Punish

In the early 1970s, Foucault’s involvement with the prisoners’ movement led him to lecture two years running on prisons at the Collège de France, which led to his work in 1975: Discipline and Punish: The Birth of the Prison. The subtitle here references The Birth of the Clinic, indicating some continuity of project; both titles in turn of course reference Nietzsche’s Birth of Tragedy.

Discipline and Punish is a book about the emergence of the prison system. The conclusion of the book in relation to this subject matter is that the prison is an institution, the objective purpose of which is to produce criminality and recidivism. The system encompasses the movement that calls for reform of the prisons as an integral and permanent part. This thesis is somewhat obscured by a particular figure from the book that has garnered much more attention, namely Jeremy Bentham’s “panopticon,” a design for a prison in which every prisoner’s every action was visible, which greatly influenced nineteenth century penal architecture, and indeed institutional architecture more generally, up to the level of city planning. Though Foucault is often presented as a theorist of “panopticism,” this is not the central claim of the book.

The more important general theme of the book is that of “discipline” in the penal sense, a specific historical form of power that was taken up by the state with professional soldiering in the 17th century, and spread widely across society, first via the panoptic prison, then via the division of labor in the factory and universal education. The purpose of discipline is to produce “docile bodies,” the individual movements of which can be controlled, and which in its turn involves the psychological monitoring and control of individuals, indeed which for Foucault produces individuals as such.

b. The Will to Knowledge

Foucault indeed focused on the concept of power so much that he remarked that he produced the analysis of power relations rather than the genealogies he had intended. Foucault began talking about power as soon as he began to do genealogy, in The Order of Discourse. In Discipline and Punish he develops a notion of “power-knowledge,” recombining the analysis of the epistemic with analysis of the political. Knowledge now for Foucault is incomprehensible apart from power, although Foucault continues to insist on the relative autonomy of discourse, introducing the notion of power-knowledge precisely as a replacement for the Marxist notion of ideology in which knowledge is seen as distorted by class power; for Foucault, there is no pure knowledge apart from power, but knowledge also has real and irreducible importance for power.

Foucault sketches a notion of power in Discipline and Punish, but his conception of power is primarily expounded only in a work published the following year in 1976, the first volume of his History of Sexuality, with the title The Will to Knowledge. The latter is a reference to Nietzsche’s Will to Power (this original French title is that of the current Penguin English edition – the English translation published in America, however, is titled simply The History of Sexuality: An Introduction).

The Will to Knowledge is an extraordinarily influential work, perhaps Foucault’s most influential. The central thesis of the book is that, contrary to popular perceptions that we are sexually repressed, the entire notion of sexual repression is part and parcel of a general imperative for us to talk about sex like never before: the production of behavior is represented simply as the liberation of innate tendencies.

The problem, says Foucault, is that we have a negative conception of power, which leads us only to call power that which prohibits, while the production of behavior is not problematized at all. Foucault claims that all previous political theory has found itself stuck in a view of power propagated in connection to absolute monarchy, and that our political thought has not caught up with the French Revolution, hence there is today a need “to cut off the head of the king” in political theory. Foucault’s point is that we imagine power as being a thing that can be possessed by individuals, as organized pyramidally, with one person at the apex, operating via negative sanctions. Foucault argues that power is in fact more amorphous and autonomous than this, and essentially relational. That is, power consists primarily not of something a person has, but rather is a matter of what people do, subsistsing in our interactions with one another in the first instance. As such, power is completely ubiquitous to social networks. People, one may say crudely, moreover, are as much products of power as they are wielders of it. Power thus has a relative autonomy apropos of people, just as they do apropos of it: power has its own strategic logics, emerging from the actions of people within a network of power relations. The carceral system and the device of sexuality are two prime examples of such strategies of power: they are not constructed deliberately by anyone or even by any class, but rather emerge out of themselves.

This leads Foucault to an analysis of the specific historical dynamics of power. He introduces the concept of “biopower,” which combines disciplinary power as discussed in Discipline and Punish, with a “biopolitics” that invests people’s live at a biological level, “making” us live according to norms, in order to regulate humanity at the level of the population, while keeping in reserve the bloody sword of “thanatopolitics,” now exaggerated into an industrial warfare that kills millions. This specific historical thesis is dealt with in more detail in the article Foucault and Feminism, in the first section. Foucault’s concerns with sexuality, bodies, and norms form a potent mix that has, via the work of Judith Butler in particular, been one of the main influences on contemporary feminist thought, as well as influential in diverse areas of the humanities and social sciences.

c. Lecture Series

After his lectures on prisons, Foucault for two years returned to the old theme of institutional psychiatry in work that effectively provides a bridge between the theme (and theory) of the genealogy of prisons, and that of sexuality. The first of these, Psychiatric Power, is a genealogical sequel to the The History of Madness. The second, Abnormal, is closer to The Will to Knowledge: as its title suggests, it is concerned with the production of norms, though again not straying far from the psyciatric context. The following year, 1976, Foucault lectured on the genealogy of racism in Society Must Be Defended, which provides a useful companion to The Will to Knowledge, and contains perhaps the clearest exposition of Foucault’s thoughts on biopower. The publication of these lecture series, and, a fortiori, of the lecture series that were given in the eight years in between the publication of The Will to Knowledge and the deathbed publication of the next volumes of The History of Sexuality are transforming our picture of Foucault’s later thought.

5. Governmentality

The notion of biopolitics, as the regulation of populations, brought Foucault’s thinking to the question of the state. Foucault’s work on power had generally been a matter of minimizing the importance of the state in the network of power relations, but now he started to ask about it specifically, via a genealogy of “government,” first in Security, Territory, Population, and then in his genealogy of neoliberalism, The Birth of Biopolitics. Foucault here coins the term “governmentality,” which has a rather shifting meaning.

The function of the notion of governmentality is to throw the focus of thinking about contemporary societies onto government as such, as a technique, rather than to focus on the state or the economy. Well before the publication of these lecture series in recent years, one of these lectures from Security, Territory, Population, dealing with this concept and published in English as “Governmentality,” had already become the basis for what is effectively an entire school of sociology and political theory.

This notion of government takes Foucault’s researches on biopower and puts them on a more human plane, in a tendential move away from the bracketing of subjectivity that had marked Foucault’s approach up to that point. The notion of government for Foucault, like that of power, straddles a gap between the statecraft that is ordinarily called “government” today, and personal conduct, so-called “government of the self.” The two are closely related inasmuch as, in a rather Aristotelian way, governing others depends on one’s relation to oneself. This thematic indeed takes Foucault in precisely the direction of Ancient Greek ethics.

6. Ethics

Foucault’s final years lecturing at the Collège de France, the early 1980s, saw Foucault’s attention move from modern reflections on government, first to Christian thought, then to Ancient. Foucault is here following the genealogy of government, but there are other factors at work. Another reason for this trajectory is the History of Sexuality project, for which Foucault found it necessary to move further and further back in time to trace the roots of contemporary thinking about sex. However, one might ask why Foucault never found it necessary to do this with any other area, for example madness, where doubtless the roots could have been traced further back. Another reason for this turn, then, at this time was a changed climate in French academe, where, the political militancy of the seventies in abeyance, there was a general “turn to ethics.”

The ultimate output of this period was the second and third volumes of the History of Sexuality, written and published at the same time, and constituting in effect a single intellectual effort. These volumes deal with Ancient sex literature, Greek and then Roman. They lack great theoretical conclusions like those of the first volume. They are patient studies of primary texts, and ones that are further from the present, both in the sense of dealing with more chronologically remote material, and in the sense of their relevance to our present-day concerns, than any others Foucault ever made. The relevance of the historical analysis is particularly unclear due to the absence of the fourth volume of the History of Sexuality. It was partially drafted but far from complete, and hence is unpublished and likely to remain so. In dealing with the Christian part of the history of the sexuality, it serves to link the second and third volumes to the first.

The extant volumes chart the changes that occurred within Ancient thinking about sex, between Greek and Roman thinking. There are certainly significant changes over the thousand years of Ancient writing about sex – an increasing attention on individuals for example – but for the purposes of the present it is the general differences between Ancient and modern attitudes that is more instructive. For the Ancients, sex was consistently a relatively minor ethical concern, simply one of many concerns relevant to diet and health more generally.

What Foucault got from studying this material, which he discussed in relation to the present primarily elsewhere than in these two books, is the notion of an ethics concerned with one’s relation to one’s self. Self-constitution is the overarching problematic of Foucault’s research in his final years. This “care for the self” Foucault manifestly finds attractive, though he is scathing of the precise modality it takes in patriarchal Ancient society, and he expresses some wish to resurrect such an ethics today, though he demurs on the question of whether such a resurrection is really possible. Thus, the point for Foucault is not to expound an ethics; it is rather the new analytical possibilities of focusing on subjectivity itself, rather than bracketing it as Foucault had tended to do previously. Foucault becomes interested increasingly in the way subjectivity is constituted precisely by the way in which subjects produce themselves via a relation to truth. Foucault now proclaims that his work was always about subjectivity. The dry investigations of the 1960s, while concerned explicitly about truth, were always about the way in which “the human subject fits into certain games of truth.”

7. References and Further Reading

Below is a list of English translations of works by Foucault that are named above, in the order they were originally written. The shorter writings and interviews of Foucault are also of extraordinary interest, particularly to philosophers. In French, these have been published in an almost complete collection, Dits et écrits, by Gallimard, both in a four volume edition and a two-volume edition. In English, however, Foucault’s shorter works are spread across many overlapping anthologies, which even between them omit much that is important. The three-volume Essential Works series of anthologies, published by Penguin and the New Press, and edited by Paul Rabinow (vol. 1 Ethics, vol. 2 Aesthetics, vol. 3 Power), are the closest to a comprehensive collection in English, although the most compendious single-volume anthology is Foucault Live. Edited by Sylvère Lotringer. New York: Semiotext(e), 1996.

a. Primary

  • Mental illness and psychology. Berkeley: University of California Press, 1987.
  • The History of Madness. London: Routledge, 2006.
  • Death and the Labyrinth. London: Continuum, 2004.
  • Birth of the Clinic. London: Routledge, 1989.
  • The Order of Things. London: Tavistock, 1970.
  • The Archaeology of Knowledge. New York: Pantheon, 1972.
  • Psychiatric Power. New York: Palgrave Macmillan, 2006.
  • Discipline and Punish. London: Allen Lane, 1977.
  • Abnormal. London: Verso, 2003.
  • Society Must Be Defended. New York: Picador, 2003.
  • An Introduction. Vol. 1 of The History of Sexuality. New York: Pantheon, 1978. Reprinted as The Will to Knowledge, London: Penguin, 1998.
  • Security, Territory, Population. New York: Picador, 2009.
  • The Birth of Biopolitics. New York: Picador, 2010.

b. Secondary

  • Timothy J. Armstrong (ed.). Michel Foucault: Philosopher. Hemel Hempstead: Harvester Wheatsheaf, 1992.
    • A particularly good collection of papers on Foucault from his contemporaries.
  • Gilles Deleuze. Foucault. Trans. Seán Hand. London: Athlone, 1988.
    • The best book about Foucault’s work, from one who knew him, though predictably idiosyncratic.
  • Gary Gutting. Michel Foucault's archaeology of scientific reason. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1989.
    • The definitive volume on Foucault’s archaeological period, and on Foucault and the philosophy of science.
  • Gary Gutting (ed.). Cambridge Companion to Foucault. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1994.
    • Brilliant and comprehensive introductory essays on aspects of Foucault’s thought.
  • David Couzens Hoy (ed.). Foucault: A Critical Reader. Oxford: Blackwell, 1986.
  • Mark G. E. Kelly. The Political Philosophy of Michel Foucault. New York: Routledge, 2009.
    • For the political aspect of Foucault’s thought, from a philosophical perspective.
  • David Macey. The Lives of Michel Foucault. London: Hutchison, 1993.
    • This is the most comprehensive and most sober of the available biographies of Foucault.
  • David Macey. Michel Foucault. London : Reaktion Books, 2004.
    • A readable, abbreviated biography of Foucault.
  • Michael Mahon. Foucault’s Nietschean Genealogy: Truth, Power, and the Subject. Albany: SUNY Press, 1992.
    • A pointedly philosophical work on the influence of Nietzsche on Foucault.
  • Jeremy Moss (ed.).The Later Foucault. London: Sage, 1998.
    • On Foucault’s late work.
  • Barry Smart (ed.). Michel Foucault: Critical Assessments (mutli-volume). London: Routledge, 1995.

Author Information

Mark Kelly
Middlesex University
United Kingdom

Diogenes of Apollonia (5th cn. B.C.E.)

Diogenes of Apollonia is often considered to be the last of the Presocratic Greek philosophers, although it is more than likely that Democritus was still active after the death of Diogenes. Diogenes’ main importance in the history of philosophy is that he synthesized the earlier Ionic monism of Anaximenes and Heraclitus with the pluralism of Empedocles and Anaxagoras. Diogenes serves as a sort of culminating point for Presocratic philosophy, uniting its differing tendencies toward emphasizing the absolute indivisibility or identity of reality with the equally absolute multiplicity of differing beings. Just as for Heraclitus, the truth for Diogenes was that one self-identical thing is all different things. By abiding by the Presocratic natural law that out of nothing comes nothing and into nothing, nothing goes, Diogenes proposed a definition of nature that identified it with life and explicitly affirmed that it is generated from itself. Diogenes’ main idea was that nature, the entire universe, is an indivisibly infinite, eternally living, and continuously moving substance he called, following Anaximenes, air. All the natural changes occurring throughout the universe—the various forms, the incalculable multiplicity the singular being takes—are one substance, air, under various modes. Air is also intelligent. Indeed, air is intelligence, or noesis in the Ancient Greek. Noesis is the purely intuitive, rational thinking that expresses and sustains all cosmic processes. As the self-causal power of rational, intuitive intelligence, air is also a god. When defining air solely as an atmospheric condition, as we do today, and in relation to the three other main elements, namely, fire, water, and earth, Diogenes’ air becomes the soul of singular beings. The soul is the source of every living thing’s sensitive ability to live, know, and thus also affect and be affected by other singular beings. The soul is also the way the absolute cosmic air identifies itself through a number of living differentiations as the means by which living creatures exhibit their differing degrees of temperature and density.  Through the soul, air is sometimes rarer or more condensed, and likewise sometimes hotter or cooler. The soul is the life-principle that, when mixed with and operating through other aerated forms like blood and veins, allows for the living functions of all singular beings to remain self-sustaining until the necessary process of decomposition affects them. Such decomposition, however, is just another means for nature’s processes to continue to function insofar as each decomposed being is the simultaneous site for the next modification that air will engender and express through itself. Ultimately, for Diogenes, the essence of all reality, identified as intelligent and divine air, is that it is both nature and life, as nature and life are identical as one absolute substance.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Work
  2. Substance Monism
  3. Air
  4. Intelligence and Divinity
  5. Cosmology and Physiology
  6. Influence and Historical Role
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Life and Work

The exact chronology of the life of Diogenes of Apollonia is unknown, but most accounts place the date of his acme somewhere around 460-430 BCE.  It was once believed that he was from the Cretan city of Apollonia, but it is now thought that the Apollonia of which he was a citizen was the Milesian colony on the Pontus that was actually founded by the Presocratic philosopher Anaximander, and which is today the Bulgarian Black Sea resort town of Sozopol. It is also thought Diogenes lived for some time in Athens and that while there, he became so unpopular (being thought an atheist) that his life was in danger. Further proof of Diogenes’ probable residence in Athens is the parody we find of him in Aristophanes’ The Clouds, even though it is Socrates who is portrayed as holding Diogenes’ views. Diogenes Laertius writes, “Diogenes, son of Apollothemis, an Apolloniate, a physicist and a man of exceptional repute. He was a pupil of Anaximenes, as Antisthenes says. His period was that of Anaxagoras” (IX, 57). Theophrastus also mentions that Diogenes of Apollonia was ‘almost the youngest’ of the physical philosophers. It has been persuasively put forward that Diogenes Laertius was more than likely confused when he wrote that Diogenes of Apollonia was a pupil of Anaximenes, considering the agreed upon earliness and geographic location of Diogenes by most commentators. Like Anaximenes, however, Diogenes held that the fundamental substance of nature is air, but it is highly unlikely he could have studied with him. On the other hand, the view that Diogenes flourished in roughly the same period as Anaxagoras is uncontroversial.

There has been much debate over whether Diogenes wrote a single book or even as many as four. Only fragments of Diogenes’ work survive. A majority of the fragments that we have of Diogenes’ work come from Simplicius’ commentaries on Aristotle’s Physics and On the Heavens. Simplicius writes,

Since the generality of enquirers say that Diogenes of Apollonia made air the primary element, similarly to Anaximenes, while Nicolaus in his theological investigation relates that Diogenes declared the material principle to be between fire and air…, it must be realized that several books were written by this Diogenes (as he himself mentioned in On Nature, where he says that he had spoken also against the physicists—whom he calls ‘sophists’—and written a Meteorology, in which he also says he spoke about the material principle, as well as On the Nature of Man); in the On Nature, at least, which alone of his works came into my hands, he proposes a manifold demonstration that in the material principle posited by him is much intelligence. (Kirk, Raven, and Schofield: 1983, 435)

The debate is over whether On Nature is the one book that Diogenes wrote and which covered many different yet nevertheless interrelated topics (such as man, meteorology, and the Sophists), or that On Nature, On the Nature of Man, Meteorologia, and Against the Sophists were four separate works. Diels, the early German collator of the Presocratic fragments, preferred the former option (DK 64B9), while commentators like Burnet (EGP 353) prefer the latter view. It also entirely possible that Simplicius was either confused or misinformed in his reading of Diogenes because of the fact that the quotations of Diogenes’ work, which he himself provides, contain discussions, for example, on the nature of man, which should have been impossible if indeed he only had a copy of On Nature in his possession. At the same time, we have evidence from a work of the medical author Galen that a certain Diogenes wrote a treatise that dealt with a number of diseases and their causes and remedies. It is probable that this was Diogenes of Apollonia because we have other reports from Galen (and Theophrastus) that Diogenes held views about diagnosing a patient by analyzing his tongue and general complexion. This evidence, along with his discussions regarding anatomy and the function of veins, leads to the probability that Diogenes was a professional doctor of some sort who could have produced a technical medical treatise. Another interesting piece of evidence that suggests Diogenes could have been a doctor is the methodological claim he makes regarding his own form of writing, and which sounds very similar to what is said in the beginning of some of the more philosophical works in the Hippocratic corpus. Diogenes Laertius says that this was the first line of Diogenes’ book: “It is my opinion that the author, at the beginning of any account, should make his principle or starting-point indisputable, and his explanation simple and dignified” (Fr. 1).  Such a no-nonsense approach to writing was often championed by the early medical thinkers.

2. Substance Monism

Following his own recommendation that an author should clearly state his purpose up front, Diogenes began his account of nature by explicitly establishing his principle, or starting-point.  He writes:

My opinion, in sum, is that all existing things are differentiated from the same thing, and are the same thing. And this is manifest: for if the things that exist at present in this world-order—earth and water and air and fire and all the other things apparent in this world-order—if any of these were different from the other (different, that is, in its own proper nature), and did not retain an essential identity while undergoing many changes and differentiations, it would be in no way possible for them to mix with each other, or for one to help or harm the other, or for a growing plant to grow out of the earth or for a living creature or anything else to come into being, unless they were so composed as to be the same thing.  But all these things, being differentiated from the same thing, become different kinds at different times and return into the same thing. (Fr. 2)

Diogenes was what we today call a ‘substance monist’.  Substance monism is the idea that everything is one thing. In other words, it means that all putative different things essentially are one self-identical thing. Substance Monism is an answer to the question, ‘what is and how many are there? According to Diogenes, for anything to be it must paradoxically be both identical to and different from the one, the thing that is - the one substance that is everything. The differences, however, of things from the one thing that is, are never ‘proper,’ as Diogenes argues. That is to say, the differences of things are never substantial, but rather they are only adjectival differences.

Now, while we do not find the term ‘substance’ in the fragments we have of Diogenes’ writing, the idea of a substance, and, moreover, the idea of substance monism, can help us understand what Diogenes meant when he said ‘all existing things are differentiated from the same thing, and are the same thing.’ A substance is what a thing is. It is the basic being of a thing; the essential reality a thing has to have in order for it be what it is.  Things are substances if they essentially are the things they are. The essence of a substance is its own existence. This line of arguing was common to all the Presocratics because for them it was a natural law that out of nothing came nothing and into nothing, nothing went. To truly be, something had to be the essential source or cause of its own existence. Reality or being, therefore, for most of the Presocratics, and especially for Diogenes, is absolutely immanent to itself, and so all the differences there are in nature inhere in, or are internal to, it. This line of reasoning was an early version of what was to become the ontological argument. A Substance is a thing that exists because that is what it is: a thing that exists, a thing that exists on the basis of its own immanent self-sufficiency.

Diogenes was concerned with understanding what it is that makes a thing be what it is, what a thing’s substantial being is, and how many of these things or substances there really are. He wanted to know what makes a thing substantial. To understand what things are, what makes things be what they are, and how many of them there are, Diogenes simply observed both what he himself was composed of and what the primary qualities of everything he had ever experienced and thus thought about were. Like all the Presocratic philosophers, Diogenes’ chief observation was that all things are natural or physical. Diogenes observed that all things of this ‘present world-order’ are natural or physical elemental qualities such as earth, water, fire, and air. The observation that all things are natural or physical also implied that all things change, and that everything is moving in some degree, both growing and decaying, composing and decomposing, and speeding up and slowing down. For Diogenes, then, all things are physical and moving, for they are all natural and living. Therefore, the one self-identical substance that is in essence all different things is nature itself, which is the mobile, living, and absolutely physical identity of the universe. Furthermore, all the different things nature expresses of itself, or modifies via itself are variable forms of earth, water, fire, and air, which compose and decompose with each other in many ways as nature lives and moves. The elemental qualities of nature differ from each other only in degree and are in essence simply a variety of ways in which nature is identical to itself.

The observation that all things are physical, mobile, and different only in elemental degrees led Diogenes to note that if this is indeed the case then all things must be interrelated in some way. Relations, however, seem to demand some form of proper or substantial difference in order to occur. Diogenes was troubled by the apparent demands of proper duality implied by the living and flowing relations he observed as occurring throughout all of nature. The problem he had was that if all the things he observed relating throughout nature were really different from each other, then there was nothing in them or about them that made such relations even possible in the first place (for how could things truly relate that are really different from each other?) and thus, even more threateningly, everything he perceived as expressing a certain substantial identity was then utterly deceptive and false. In response to this dilemma, he noticed that if things relate in some degree, as they certainly seem to, there must be at least something they share, something in common between them that enables them to relate. That it is manifestly clear that things relate allowed Diogenes to assert the equally indubitable fact that there must be something between them they must all share that allows them to relate.  If things were so different from each other that either they could not relate at all or that their relations brought about only their total fragmentation or annihilation, nothing in nature could grow or move or become in any way radically contrary to what he observed as happening in nature. For this reason, Diogenes posited that there must be some one thing, some self-identical substance that allows all the naturally different things to interact, relate, and compose and decompose with each other. Without a fundamental substance implicitly and inherently linking all things together, nothing would have a common ground to share and work upon or a situational medium through which to change and grow. Therefore, there must be a thing that makes all things relatable, a thing that allows all things to be different from each other to some degree, yet still be connected enough to each other to allow them to interact and compose and decompose with each other. This thing, for Diogenes, was going to have to be every where, all the time because there was nowhere at any time that he did not observe natural bodies moving, growing, and relating.

Substance monism, therefore, served not only to explain the absolute immanence and essential self-identity of nature to itself, it also explained how all the kinds of living, growing, and interacting of singular beings occur throughout nature. By sharing the common substance they all modify, all the different things of nature, all the elemental and formal means of composing and decomposing could relate, interact, and help and harm each other through the infinite and eternal process of natural or physical growth and decay. In other words, for Diogenes and his kind of substance monism, being is becoming, nature is nurturing, and all forms of movement, work, creation, destruction, and causality are so many ways one self-identical substance naturally lives the life of all its self-differentiated forms. For Diogenes, substance monism entails that nature is life and that, in essence, the universe lives. One absolutely physical identity underwrites all the apparent diversity.

3. Air

Diogenes’ substance monism may seem radically opposed to what we believe today, especially with respect to our definitions of nature and life. Yet, even in Diogenes’ own time, his thinking was considered to be as peculiar and eclectic as that of many of the other Presocratics. Presocratic philosophy was often considered, in its own time and even today, to be neither religious nor scientific, but rather idiosyncratic and esoteric because of its emphasis on achieving the experience of a direct and immediate intuition of the essence of nature. Such an intuition defines the rarity and excellence of Presocratic wisdom. Like other Presocratics, Diogenes was a sage-like independent spirit who neither followed nor founded a school and who made use of the best elements of other philosophies he thought worthy of greater elaboration and which could yield him the wisdom he sought and loved. One such philosopher he borrowed from, as we mentioned, was Anaximenes. Like Anaximines, Diogenes maintained that air is the one substance of which everything is made, and is a mode of. In his Refutation of all Heresies, Hippolytus reports,

Anaximenes…said that infinite air was the principle, from which the things that are becoming, and that are, and that shall be, and gods and things divine, all come into being, and the rest from its products. The form of air is of this kind: whenever it is most equable, it is invisible to sight, but is revealed by the cold and the hot and the damp and by movement. It is always in motion; for things that change do not change unless there be movement. Through becoming denser or finer it has different appearances; for when it is dissolved into what is finer it becomes fire, while winds, again, are air that is becoming condensed, and cloud is produced from air by felting. When it is condensed still more, water is produced; with a further degree of condensation earth is produced, and when condensed as far as possible, stones. The result is that the most influential components of generation are opposites, hot and cold. (Kirk, Raven, and Schofield: 1983, 145)

Diogenes agreed with Anaximenes and proposed that air is the one substance that is reality. Following Anaximenes, Diogenes argued that air is the essential identity of all different things and that all different things are just so many forms of condensed or rarefied air. Nature, as air, is an infinite and eternal process that, through its indivisible mobility and continuity, constantly becomes all the ways it comes to be and passes away through an absolute multiplicity of singular beings. All different things are momentarily denser or finer forms or modes of one ubiquitous air. Through Simplicius, Theophrastus tells us,

Diogenes the Apolloniate, almost the youngest of those who occupied themselves with these matters (that is, physical studies), wrote for the most part in an eclectic fashion, following Anaxagoras in some things and Leucippus in others. He, too, says that the substance of the universe is infinite and eternal air, from which, when it is condensed and rarefied and changed in its dispositions, the form of other things comes into being. This is what Theophrastus relates about Diogenes; and the book of Diogenes which has reached me, entitled On Nature, clearly says that air is that from which all the rest come into being. (Fr. 2)

Now, there is for us something obviously problematic about Diogenes’ thinking regarding air. The problem we have with trying to reconcile Diogenes’ thinking with what we know today is figuring out how ‘air’ can still be an absolutely cosmic, indivisibly infinite, and eternally living substance when it is limited to only the earth’s atmosphere. We understand air today to be reducible to other properties. To approach this problem it must first be understood what Diogenes meant by the term we are using. Aer in Ancient Greek was rooted in the verb ‘to blow, or breathe’ and the term often denoted a certain sense of loftiness and light, spirited movement.  Aer was also associated with the wind, the sky, and brightness. What Diogenes meant by air was the celerity and rapidity of the light and fluid movement of nature’s waxing and waning, its constant condensing and rarefying, its expanding and contracting. Air, for Diogenes, is the gaseous fluidity of all living and natural phenomena. It is important to understand that by ‘air’ Diogenes did not intend the grand total of all the substantially distinct atoms of oxygen, nitrogen, argon and so on that compose our atmosphere, but rather the simple fact that all things are natural, living, and moving. Air, for Diogenes, was both the constant stirring of the atmosphere as a singular elemental formation, and also all the ‘inhalations’ and ‘exhalations’ of the planetary and celestial movements. Air expresses the becoming of being, the living of nature. A mobile movement, a movement conceived not as the attribute or property of an immobile substance, but rather as a substance itself, movement itself conceived as substance, is what Diogenes understood by air. Air is the indivisible body that is the universe, all that is: “this very thing [air] is both eternal and immortal body, but of the rest some come into being, some pass away” (Fr. 7). And of the rest that come into being and pass away, they are all ways air modifies itself.  Atmospheric air is, therefore, another way absolute, substantial air (aer) becomes and expresses itself.

4. Intelligence and Divinity

Diogenes, moreover, says that air is intelligence. The Ancient Greek term for intelligence is noesis. Noesis is not just intelligence in the sense of being sharp or smart. What Diogenes designated by noesis was the active power of a mind to immediately intuit and know what it thinks. Noesis is not so much a belief held by a mind, as it is the activity of thinking itself that is a mind. A mind is an actively thinking thing. Now, we might be wondering how the absolute cosmic substance, air, could also have an immediately intuitive and active mind, that is, how it could also be a thinking thing. First, it is important to keep in mind that everything was physical for Diogenes. Thinking was a physical process for him that was not limited to only organisms with brains. (There will be more on this in the next section.) In other words, thinking did not solely mean cognition for Diogenes. Air is intelligence itself; pure thought intuitively thinking itself.  Just as all singular bodies are in air as modes or ways it modifies and transforms itself through condensation and rarefaction, so too are all minds, all intellects or intelligent beings, in air as modes or ideas through which it immediately intuits and thus thinks itself. If air is intelligence, or purely active thinking, and intelligence is thus the one indivisible body that imbues everything, then every singular body is also going to be imbued with mind. Second, Diogenes argued that intelligence was the power inherent to air with which it could absolutely and internally differentiate itself in a rational and measured fashion. We have already seen the four main elements of nature as an example of this rational and measured differentiation. Intelligence was for Diogenes a sufficient reason for all the differences of degree found throughout nature:

For, he [Diogenes] says, it would not be possible without intelligence for it [sc. the substance] so to be divided up that it has measures of all things—of winter and summer and night and day and rains and winds and fair weather. The other things, too, if one wishes to consider them, one would find disposed in the best possible way. (Fr. 3)

The intelligence and the soul, the thinking and the living of singular beings are modifications of substantial air-intelligence. Through the cessation of breathing, sensing, and knowing, living beings decompose and lose their intelligence, but only so there can be a simultaneous re-composition of air-intelligence elsewhere. Diogenes says, “Men and the other living creatures live by means of air, through breathing it. And this is for them both soul [that is, life principle] and intelligence, as will be clearly shown in this work; and if this is removed, then they die and intelligence fails.” (Fr. 7)

Diogenes also says that air is divine. Divinity designated natural power for the Presocratics, who also tended not to anthropomorphize their gods. Instead, a divinity for the first philosophers was more a natural force, usually an elemental power found permeating all of nature and imbuing it with all its creative and destructive power. Along with substance monism, pantheism—the idea that everything is divine, that God is all things—was an idea shared by many of the Presocratics. For Diogenes, his substance monism definitely entailed pantheism. Air-intelligence is divine. Only a god could remain identical to itself while also rationally differentiating itself through an infinity of singular beings. Only a god as well could have the intuitive intelligence to actively and affirmatively know all the self-identical differentiations it expressed of itself. As Diogenes says, it is only nature conceived as an absolutely immanent and divine air-intelligence that could be “both great and strong and eternal and immortal and much-knowing (Fr. 8).” Diogenes summarized all these points wonderfully when he wrote:

And it seems to me that that which has intelligence is what men call air, and that all men are steered by this and that it has power over all things. For this very thing seems to me to be a god and to have reached everywhere and to dispose all things and to be in everything. And there is no single thing that does not have a share of this; but nothing has an equal share of it, one with another, but there are many fashions both of air itself and of intelligence. For it is many-fashioned, being hotter and colder and drier and moister and more stationary and more swiftly mobile, and many other differentiations are in it both of taste and of color unlimited in number. And yet of all living creatures the soul is the same, air that is warmer than the outside, in which we exist, but much cooler than that near the sun. But in none of living creatures is this warmth alike (since it is not even so in individual men); the difference is not great, but as much as still allows them to be similar. Yet it is not possible for anything to become truly alike, one to the other, of the things undergoing differentiation, without becoming the same. Because, then, the differentiation is many-fashioned, living creatures are many fashioned and many in number, resembling each other neither in form nor in way of life nor in intelligence, because of the number of differentiations. Nevertheless, they all live and see and hear by the same thing, and have the rest of their intelligence from the same thing. (Fr. 5)

5. Cosmology and Physiology

Singular beings are not only composed of air, they also live and have intelligence by breathing air. The soul or life principle of all things is an absolute and divine air-intelligence that, in a sense, breathes through itself in all the forms it takes on. Air is both eternal and omnipresent as it takes on an unlimited number of forms. Like many of the Presocratics, Diogenes provides an account of how air modifies itself through a variety of physical compositions ranging from galaxies and solar systems to respiratory, circulatory, and cognitive systems. Diogenes provides us with a cosmogony that explains the creation of the earth and sun on the basis of the condensation and rarefaction of air. In The pseudo-Plutarchean Stromateis, which Eusebius preserved, it is stated that:

Diogenes the Apolloniate premises that air is the element, and that all things are in motion and the worlds innumerable. He gives this account of cosmogony: the whole was in motion, and became rare is some places and dense in others; where the dense ran together centripetally it made the earth, and so the rest by the same method, while the lightest parts took the upper position and produce the sun. (Kirk, Raven, and Schofield: 1983, 445)

Diogenes also made some cosmological observations. He gave an interesting account of heavenly bodies that included an attempt to explain meteorites.

Diogenes says that the heavenly bodies are like pumice-stone, and he considers them as the breathing-holes of the world; and they are fiery. With the visible heavenly bodies are carried round invisible stones, which for this reason have no name: they often fall on the earth and are extinguished, like the stone star that made its fiery descent at Aegospotami. (Kirk, Raven, and Schofield: 1983, 445)

There are many similarities between Diogenes’ cosmogony and cosmology and that of his fellow Presocratics. First, he posits the existence of innumerable worlds like many other Presocratics. It makes sense that Diogenes asserts an immeasurable plurality of worlds because he places no restrictions to the amount of differentiations and composition air can take. Why wouldn’t there be a plethora of worlds littered throughout the universe insofar as worlds are, by definition, just momentary formations of the universe (air) anyway? Secondly, it is from Anaxagoras that Diogenes likely borrowed the idea of a noetic substance forming a vortex within itself. Thirdly, it was common in the Ionic tradition to describe the origin of the earth as the formation of more concentrated and denser material in the center of such a vortex. Likewise, the rarer material would go to the extremes of the vortex, following the law that differentiation is a symmetrical process whereby like follows like. Lighter air, therefore, tends towards greater heights and extremities while denser air tends to concentrate into relative core positions. With respect to astronomical objects, it seems Diogenes said heavenly bodies were like pumice stone because pumice is both glowing and light, or ‘airy,’ and composed of translucent and very porous bubble walls, which are, once again, qualities that accommodate the substance that Diogenes countenances.

From extrasolar objects and the solar system down to the earth itself, Diogenes continues to explain all physical and psychological phenomena as so many self-modifying processes of one substantial air. Within and through the atmospheric air of our planet, Diogenes addresses the thinking and sensing of particular organisms. The law of like following like is as applicable on earth as it is throughout the cosmos. From Theophrastus’ de sensu, Diogenes is reported as having a detailed theory of sensation and cognition based on the reception and circulation of air within and between singular beings. Each of the five senses are dealt with in terms of how they process air. Degrees of intelligence or cognitive ability are also delineated by the amount and kind of air each being possesses. The differences between beings are defined by how swiftly, and with how much agility, they engender and circulate. Some beings, for example, have more intelligence, or more complex brain activity while others have say, a better sense of smell. All kinds of perception, however, are ways that air processes and modifies itself.

Diogenes attributes thinking and the senses, as also life, to air.  Therefore he would seem to do so by the action of similars (for he says that there would be no action of being acted upon, unless all things were from one). The sense of smell is produced by the air round the brain…Hearing is produced whenever the air within the ears, being moved by the air outside, spreads toward the brain. Vision occurs when things are reflected on the pupil, and it, being mixed with the air within, produces a sensation. A proof of this is that, if there is an inflammation of the veins (that is, those in the eye), there is no mixture with the air within, nor vision, although the reflexion exists exactly as before. Taste occurs to the tongue by what is rare and gentle. About touch he gave no definition, either about its nature or its objects. But after this he attempts to say what is the cause of more accurate sensations, and what sort of objects they have. Smell is keenest for those who have least air in their heads, for it is mixed most quickly; and, in addition, if a man draws it in through a longer and narrower channel; for in this way it is more swiftly assessed. Therefore some living creatures are more perceptive of smell than are men; yet nevertheless, if the smell were symmetrical with the air, with regard to mixture, man would smell perfectly….(Kirk, Raven, and Schofield: 1983, 448).

It seems that for Diogenes correspondence in perception entails a matching-up of the degrees of air within the brain with air that is being received through the sensitive faculties. Sensation itself is the reception of air by air and so is a mixing of airs through the aerated blood channels that are themselves oxygenated through respiration.  (Diogenes also attempted an anatomy of the veins.) Usually, the reception of air by air takes place in an organism as an agitation or irritation of the sense organs and thus also the brain. An accurate or adequate perception is one in which there is a mutually interpenetrating coalescence of finer air flows within, between, and amongst the parts of organisms and the finer air received through sensations. This entails that a certain kind of affective or sensitive openness, which can be regarded as a susceptibility to finer air, allows for greater perceptual correspondences with the other kinds of air-composites.  Such affective openness implies that one must come to pursue or avoid interaction with other air-composites in accordance with how they increase or decrease one’s respiratory and cognitive abilities. The trick is to have sensitive correspondences serve the rationally differentiated regulatory systems that allow organisms to survive and persevere. Overall, Diogenes was one of the first thinkers to emphasis the relationship between sensation, respiration, and cognition.

Theophrastus continues in his report of Diogenes’ thinking regarding sensation and cognition. Pleasure and pain are also definable by the sensitive reception and circulation of air.

That the air within perceives, being a small portion of the god, is indicated by the fact that often, when we have our mind on other things, we neither see nor hear.  Pleasure and pain come about in this way: whenever air mixes in quantity with blood and lightens it, being in accordance with nature, and penetrates through the whole body, pleasure is produced; but whenever the air is present contrary to nature and does not mix, then the blood coagulates and becomes weaker and thicker, and pain is produced. Similarly, confidence and health and their opposites…Thought, as has been said, is caused by pure and dry air; for a moist emanation inhibits the intelligence; for this reason thought is diminished in sleep, drunkenness, and surfeit. That moisture removes intelligence is indicated by the fact that other living creatures are inferior in intellect, for they breathe the air from the earth and take to themselves moister sustenance. (Kirk, Raven, and Schofield: 1983, 448)

The key to cultivating a stronger intelligence, greater pleasures, and a good sense of taste (for the wise man is the sage, the sapiens, the one who tastes well) is to take in, breathe, and allow to permeate one’s organic structure the finer, lighter, dryer, warmer, and swifter air. To breathe well is to live well. To stand erect, awake, warm-blooded, firm, and at attention is to manifest a stronger and more well-regulated and attuned disposition.  Like Heraclitus, Diogenes advises that one must avoid excessive moistening. To become more god-like, more substantially identical with what one essentially is, one should actively, aggressively, and affirmatively seek out other aerated bodies of similar dispositions and compose well with them. Certain compositions lead to the reproduction of new organic forms. Since air is the vitality of its own natural and substantial existence, it will continuously reproduce itself through the distribution of its own aerated seeds.  Indeed, air, understood as nature’s ubiquitous and eternal living, is constantly conceiving itself, impregnating and giving birth to its own various forms of gradients of denser or finer air.

Diogenes, it is worth mentioning, also had an interest in embryology. The self-conception of air takes place through the intermingling of aerated sperm and eggs. For Diogenes, life grows naturally and intelligently at all levels because of the aerated nature of blood and veins.

And in the continuation he shows that also the sperm of living creatures is aerated and acts of intelligence take place when the air, with the blood, gains possession of the whole body through the veins; in the course of which he gives an accurate anatomy of the veins. Now in this he clearly says that what men call air is the material principle. (Fr. 5)

6. Influence and Historical Role

The Eleatic philosophers were monists, believing that were there two things, we would have to say of one that it is not (the other). They thought, however, that one may not speak of what is not, as one would be speaking of nothing. The fact that there is only one thing in existence was thought to entail that change could not occur, as there would need to be two things for there to be the relata required for a causal relation. Diogenes seems to have agreed with the monistic aspect of the Eleatic philosophy while attempting to accommodate the possibility of change. His move was to claim that one thing might be a causa sui, and that the change we experience is the alteration thereof. The substance best suited as the substrate was thought to be air, and here rings reminiscent the view of Anaximenes. One also finds, arguably, the influence of Anaxagoras, when one considers the claim that this substance is intelligence or nous. Finally, it is worth noting that the idea that the universe is a living being is broached in Plato’s Timaeus. And the idea of substance monism has had other advocates in the history of philosophy, most famous perhaps being Benedict Spinoza

7. References and Further Reading

There are no monographs on Diogenes of Apollonia in English. Unfortunately, Diogenes has been given rather brief attention throughout the secondary literature. Diogenes is usually addressed in chapters in books on the Presocratics.

  • Barnes, Jonathan. The Presocratic Philosophers. London: Routledge & Kegan Paul (1 vol. ed.), 1982, 568-592.
  • Burnet, J. Early Greek Philosophy. London: Black (4th ed.), 1930.
  • Diels, H. “Leukippos und Diogenes von Apollonia.” RM 42, 1887, 1-14.
  • Diller, H. “Die philosophiegeschichtliche Stellung des Diogenes von Apollonia.” Hermes 76, 1941, 359-81.
  • Guthrie, W.K.C. The Presocratic Tradition from Parmenides to Democritus. Vol. II. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1993, 362-381.
  • Huffmeier, F. “Teleologische Weltbetrachtung bei Diogenes von Apollonia.” Philologus 107, 1963, 131-38.
  • Jaeger, Werner. The Theology of the Early Greek Philosophers. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1967, 155-171.
  • Kirk, G.S., J.E. Raven, and M. Schofield. The Presocratic Philosophers. 2nd edn. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1983.
  • Laks, Andre. “Soul, Sensation, and Thought.” The Cambridge Companion to Early Greek Philosophy. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1999, 250-270.
  • Laks, Andre. Diogene d’ Apollonie. Paris: Lille, 1983.
  • McKirahan, Richard D. Philosophy Before Socrates. Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Company, 1994, 344-352.
  • Shaw, J. R. “A Note on the Anatomical and Philosophical Claims of Diogenes of Apollonia.” Aperion 11.1, 1977, 53-7.
  • Warren, James. Presocratics. Berkeley: University of California Press, 2007, 175-181.

Author Information

Jason Dockstader
University College Cork

Jerry A. Fodor (1935— )

J. FodorJerry Fodor is one of the principal philosophers of mind of the late twentieth and early twenty-first century. In addition to having exerted an enormous influence on virtually every portion of the philosophy of mind literature since 1960, Fodor’s work has had a significant impact on the development of the cognitive sciences. In the 1960s, along with Hilary Putnam, Noam Chomsky, and others, he put forward influential criticisms of the behaviorism that dominated much philosophy and psychology at the time. Since then, Fodor has articulated and defended an alternative, realist conception of intentional states and their content that he argues vindicates the core elements of folk psychology within a physicalist framework.

Fodor has developed two theories that have been particularly influential across disciplinary boundaries. He defends a “Representational Theory of Mind,” according to which mental states are computational relations that organisms bear to mental representations that are physically realized in the brain. On Fodor’s view, these mental representations are internally structured much like sentences in a natural language, in that they have both syntactic structure and a compositional semantics. Fodor also defends an influential hypothesis about mental architecture, namely, that low-level sensory systems (and language) are “modular,” in the sense that they’re “informationally encapsulated” from the higher-level “central” systems responsible for belief formation, decision-making, and the like. Fodor’s work on modularity has been especially influential among evolutionary psychologists, who go much further than Fodor in claiming that the systems underlying even high-level cognition are modular, a view that Fodor himself vehemently resists.

Fodor has also defended a number of other influential views. He was an early proponent of the claim that mental properties are functional properties, defined by their role in a cognitive system and not by the physical material that constitutes them. Alongside functionalism, Fodor defended an early and influential version of non-reductive physicalism, according to which mental properties are realized by, but not reducible to, physical properties of the brain. Fodor has also long been a staunch defender of nativism about the structure and contents of the human mind, arguing against a variety of empiricist theories and famously arguing that all lexical concepts are innate. When it comes to a theory of concepts, Fodor has vigorously argued against all versions of inferential role semantics in philosophy and psychology. Fodor’s own view is what he calls “informational atomism,” according to which lexical concepts are internally unstructured and have their content in virtue of standing in certain external, “informational” relations to properties instantiated in the environment.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Physicalism, Functionalism, and the Special Sciences
  3. Intentional Realism
  4. The Representational Theory of Mind
  5. Content and Concepts
  6. Nativism
  7. Modularity
  8. References and Further Reading

1. Biography

Jerry Fodor was born in New York City in 1935. He received his A.B. from Columbia University in 1956 and his Ph.D. from Princeton University in 1960. His first academic position was at MIT, where he taught in the Departments of Philosophy and Psychology until 1986. He was Distinguished Professor at CUNY Graduate Center from 1986 to 1988, when he moved to Rutgers University where he has remained ever since. He is currently the State of New Jersey Professor of Philosophy and Cognitive Science.

2. Physicalism, Functionalism, and the Special Sciences

Throughout his career Fodor has subscribed to physicalism, the claim that all the genuine particulars and properties in the world are either identical to or in some sense determined by and dependent upon physical particulars and properties. Although there are many questions about how physicalism should be formulated and understood—for instance, what “physical” means and whether the relevant determination/dependency relation is “supervenience” (Kim 1993) or “realization” (Melnyk 2003, Shoemkaer 2007)—there’s widespread acceptance of some or other version of physicalism among philosophers of mind. To accept physicalism is to deny that psychological and other non-basic properties “float free” from the fundamental physical properties. Thus, acceptance of physicalism  goes hand in hand with a rejection of mind-body dualism.

Some of Fodor’s early work (1968, 1975) aimed (i) to show that “mentalism” was a genuine alternative to dualism and behaviorism, (ii) to show that behaviorism had a number of serious shortcomings, (iii) to defend functionalism as the appropriate physicalist metaphysics underlying mentalism, and (iv) to defend a conception of psychology and other special sciences according to which higher-level laws and the properties that figure in them are irreducible to lower-level laws and properties. Let’s consider each of these in turn.


For much of the twentieth century, behaviorism was widely regarded as the only viable physicalist alternative to dualism. Fodor helped to change that, in part by drawing a clear distinction between mere mentalism, which posits the existence of internal, causally efficacious mental states, and dualism, which is mentalism plus the view that mental events require a special kind of substance. Here’s Fodor in his classic book Psychological Explanation:

[P]hilosophers who have wanted to banish the ghost from the machine have usually sought to do so by showing that truths about behavior can sometimes, and in some sense, logically implicate truths about mental states. In so doing, they have rather strongly suggested that the exorcism can be carried through only if such a logical connection can be made out. … [O]nce it has been made clear that the choice between dualism and behaviorism is not exhaustive, a major motivation for the defense of behaviorism is removed: we are not required to be behaviorists simply in order to avoid being dualists” (1968, pp. 58-59).

Fodor thus argues that there’s a middle road between dualism and behaviorism. Attributing mental states to organisms in explaining how they get around in and manipulate their environments need not involve the postulation of a mental substance different in kind from physical bodies and brains. In Fodor’s view, behaviorists influenced by Wittgenstein and Ryle ignored the distinction between mentalism and dualism—as he puts it, “confusing mentalism with dualism is the original sin of the Wittgensteinian tradition” (Fodor, 1975, p. 4).

In addition to clearly distinguishing mentalism from dualism, Fodor put forward a number of trenchant objections to behaviorism and the various arguments for it. He argued, for instance, that neither knowing about the mental states of others nor learning a language with mental terms requires that there be a logical connection, that is, a deductively valid connection, between mental and behavioral terms, thus undermining a number of epistemological and linguistic arguments for behaviorism (Fodor and Chihara 1965, Fodor 1968). Perhaps more importantly, Fodor argued that theories in cognitive psychology and linguistics provide a powerful argument against behaviorism, since they posit the existence of various mental events that are not definable in terms of, or otherwise logically connected to, overt behavior (Fodor 1968, 1975). Along with the arguments of Putnam (1963, 1967) and Chomsky (1959), among others, Fodor’s early arguments against behaviorism were an important step in the development of the then emerging cognitive sciences.

Central to this development was the rise of functionalism as a genuine alternative to behaviorism, and Fodor’s Psychological Explanation (1968) was one of the first in-depth treatments and defenses of this view (see also Putnam 1963, 1967). Unlike behaviorism, which attempts to explain behavior in terms of law-like relationships between stimulus inputs and behavioral outputs, functionalism posits that such explanations will appeal to internal properties that mediate between inputs and outputs. Indeed, the main claim of functionalism is that mental properties are individuated in terms of the various causal relations they enter into, where such relations are not restricted to mere input-output relations, but also include their relations to a host of other properties that figure in the relevant empirical theories. Although, at the time, the distinctions between various forms of functionalism weren’t as clear as they are now, Fodor’s brand of functionalism is a version of what is now known as “psycho-functionalism”. On this view, what determines the relations that define mental properties are the deliverances of empirical psychology, and not, say, the platitudes of commonsense psychology, what can be known a priori about mental properties, or the analyticities expressive of the meanings of mental expressions; see Rey (1997, ch.7) and Shoemaker (2003) for discussion.

By defining mental properties in terms of their causal roles, functionalists allow for different kinds of physical phenomena to satisfy these relations. Functionalism thus goes hand in hand with multiple realizability. In other words, if a given mental property, M, is a functional property that’s defined by a specific causal condition, C, then any number of distinct physical properties, P1, P2, P3… Pn, may each “realize” M provided that each property meets C. Functionalism thereby characterizes mental properties at a level of abstraction that ignores differences in the physical structure of the systems that have these properties. Early functionalists, like Fodor and Putnam, thus took themselves to be articulating a position that was distinct not only from behaviorism, but also from type-identity theory, which identifies mental properties with neurophysiological properties of the brain. If functionalism implies that mental properties can be realized by different physical properties in different kinds of systems (or the same system over time), then functionalism precludes identifying mental properties with physical properties.

Fodor’s functionalism, in particular, was articulated so that it was seen to have sweeping consequences for debates concerning reductionism and the unity of science. In his seminal essay “Special Sciences” (1974), Fodor spells out a metaphysical picture of the special sciences that eventually came to be called “non-reductive physicalism”. This picture is physicalist in that it accepts what Fodor calls the “generality of physics,” which is the claim that every event that falls under a special science predicate also falls under a physical predicate, but not vice versa. It’s non-reductionist in that it denies that “the special sciences should reduce to physical theories in the long run” (1974, p. 97). Traditionally, reductionists sought to articulate bridge laws that link special science predicates with physical predicates, either in the form of bi-conditionals or identity statements. Fodor argues not only that the generality of physics does not require the existence of bridge laws, but that in general such laws will be unavailable given that the events picked out by special science predicates will be “wildly disjunctive” from the perspective of physics (1974, p. 103). Multiple realizability thus guarantees that special science predicates will cross-classify phenomena picked out by purely physical predicates. This, in turn, undermines the reductionist hope of a unified science whereby the higher-level theories of the special sciences reduce to lower-level theories and ultimately to fundamental physics. On Fodor’s picture, then, the special sciences are “autonomous” in that they articulate irreducible generalizations that quantify over irreducible and casually efficacious higher-level properties (1974; see also 1998b, ch.2).

Functionalism and non-reductive physicalism are now commonplace in philosophy of mind, and provide the backdrop for many contemporary debates about psychological explanation, laws, multiple realizability, mental causation, and more. This is something for which Fodor surely deserves much of the credit (or blame, depending on one’s view; see Kim (1993) and Heil (2003) for criticisms of the metaphysical underpinnings of non-reductive physicalism).

3. Intentional Realism

A central aim of Fodor’s work has been to defend folk psychology as at least the starting point for a serious scientific psychology. At a minimum, folk psychology is committed to two kinds of states: belief-like states, which represent the environment and guide one’s behavior, and desire-like states, which represent one’s goals and motivate behavior. We routinely appeal to such states in our common-sense explanations of people’s behavior.  For example, we explain why John walked to the store in terms of his desire for milk and his belief that there’s milk for sale at the store. Fodor is impressed by the remarkable predictive power of such belief-desire explanations. The following passage is typical:

Common sense psychology works so well it disappears. It’s like those mythical Rolls Royce cars whose engines are sealed when they leave the factory; only it’s better because they aren’t mythical. Someone I don’t know phones me at my office in New York from—as it might be—Arizona. ‘Would you like to lecture here next Tuesday?’ are the words he utters. ‘Yes thank you. I’ll be at your airport on the 3 p.m. flight’ are the words that I reply. That’s all that happens, but it’s more than enough; the rest of the burden of predicting behavior—of bridging the gap between utterances and actions—is routinely taken up by the theory. And the theory works so well that several days later (or weeks later, or months later, or years later; you can vary the example to taste) and several thousand miles away, there I am at the airport and there he is to meet me. Or if I don’t turn up, it’s less likely that the theory failed than that something went wrong with the airline. … The theory from which we get this extraordinary predictive power is just good old common sense belief/desire psychology. … If we could do that well with predicting the weather, no one would ever get his feet wet; and yet the etiology of the weather must surely be child’s play compared with the causes of behavior. (1987, pp. 3-4)

Passages like this may suggest that Fodor’s intentional realism is wedded to the folk-psychological categories of “belief” and “desire”. But this isn’t so. Rather, Fodor’s claim is that there are certain core elements of folk psychology that will be shared by a mature scientific psychology. In particular, a mature psychology will posit states with the following features:

(1)  They will be intentional: they will be “about” things and they will be semantically evaluable. (In the way that the belief that Obama is President is about Obama, and can be semantically evaluated as true or false.)

(2)  They will be causally efficacious, figuring in genuine causal explanations and laws.

Fodor’s intentional realism thus doesn’t require that the folk-psychological categories themselves find a place in a mature psychology. Indeed, Fodor has suggested that the individuation conditions for beliefs are “so vague and pragmatic” that it’s doubtful they’re fit for empirical psychology (1990, p. 175). What Fodor is committed to is the claim that a mature psychology will be intentional through and through, and that the intentional states it posits will be causally implicated in law-like explanations of human behavior. Exactly which intentional states will figure in a mature psychology is a matter to be decided by empirical inquiry, not by a priori reflection on our common sense understanding.

Fodor’s defense of intentional realism is usefully viewed as part of a rationalist tradition that stresses the human mind’s striking sensitivity to indefinitely many arbitrary properties of the world. We’re sensitive not only to abstract properties such as being a democracy and being virtuous, but also to abstract grammatical properties such as being a noun phrase and being a verb phrase, as well as to such arbitrary properties as being a tiny folded piece of paper, being an oddly-shaped canteen, being a crumpled shirt, and being to the left of my favorite mug. On Fodor’s view, something can selectively respond to such properties only if it’s an intentional system capable of manipulating representations of these properties.

Of course, there are many physical systems that are responsive to environmental properties ( thermometers, paramecia) that we would not wish to count as intentional systems. Fodor’s own proposal for what distinguishes intentional systems from the rest is that only intentional systems are sensitive to “non-nomic” properties, that is, the properties of objects that do not determine that they fall under any laws of nature (Fodor 1986). Consider Fodor’s example of the property of being a crumpled shirt. Although laws govern crumpled shirts, no object is subsumed under a law in virtue of being a crumpled shirt. Nevertheless, the property of being a crumpled shirt is one that we can represent an object as having, and such representations do enter into laws of nature. For instance, there’s presumably a law-like relationship between my noticing the crumpled shirt, my desire to remark upon it, and my saying “there’s a crumpled shirt”. On Fodor’s view the job of intentional psychology is to articulate the laws governing mental representations, which figure in genuine causal explanations of people’s behavior (Fodor 1987, 1998a).

Although positing mental representations that have semantic and causal properties— states that satisfy (1) and (2) above—may not seem particularly controversial, the existence of causally efficacious intentional states has been denied by all manner of behaviorists, epiphenomenalists, Wittgensteinians, interpretationists, instrumentalists, and (at least some) connectionists. Much of Fodor’s work has been devoted to defending intentional realism against such views as they have arisen in both philosophy and psychology. In addition to defending intentional realism against the behaviorism of Skinner and Ryle (Fodor 1968, 1975, Fodor et al. 1974), Fodor has also defended it against the threat of epiphenomenalism (Fodor 1989), against Wittgenstein and other defenders of the “private language argument” (Fodor and Chihara 1965, Fodor 1975), against the eliminativism of the Churchlands (Fodor 1987, 1990), against the instrumentalism of Dennett (Fodor 1981a, Fodor and Lepore 1992), against the interpretationism of Davidson (Fodor 1990, Fodor and Lepore 1992, Fodor 2004), and against certain versions of connectionism (Fodor and Pylyshyn 1988, Fodor and McLaughlin 1990, Fodor 1998b).

Even if Fodor is right that there are intentional states that satisfy (1) and (2), there’s still the question of how such states can exist in a physical world. Intentional realists must explain, for instance, how lawful relations between intentional states can be understood physicalistically. This is particularly pressing, since at least some intentional laws describe rational relations between the intentional states they quantify over, and, ever since Descartes, philosophers have worried about how a purely physical system could exhibit rational relations (see Lowe (2008) for recent skepticism from a non-Cartesian dualist). Fodor’s Representational Theory of Mind is his attempt to answer such worries.

4. The Representational Theory of Mind

As Fodor points out, RTM is “really a loose confederation of theses” that “lacks, to put it mildly, a canonical formulation” (1998a, p. 6). At its core, though, RTM is an attempt to combine Alan Turing’s work on computation with intentional realism (as outlined above). Broadly speaking, RTM claims that mental processes are computational processes, and that intentional states are relations to mental representations that serve as the domain of such processes. On Fodor’s version of RTM, these mental representations have both syntactic structure and a compositional semantics. Thinking thus takes place in an internal language of thought.

Turing showed us how to construct a purely mechanical device that could transform syntactically-individuated symbols in such a way as to respect the semantic relations that exist between the meanings, or contents, of those symbols. Formally valid inferences are the paradigm. For instance, modus ponens can be realized on a machine that’s sensitive only to syntactic properties of symbols. The device thus doesn’t have “access” to the symbols’ semantic properties, but can nevertheless transform the symbols in a truth-preserving way. What’s interesting about this, from Fodor’s perspective, is that, at least sometimes, mental processes also involve chains of thoughts that are truth-preserving. As Fodor puts it:

[I]f you start out with a true thought, and you proceed to do some thinking, it is very often the case that the thoughts that thinking leads you to will also be true. This is, in my view, the most important fact we know about minds; no doubt it’s why God bothered to give us any. (1994, p. 9; see also 1987, pp. 12-14, 2000, p. 18)

In order to account for this “most important” fact, RTM claims that thoughts themselves are syntactically-structured representations, and that mental processes are computational processes defined over them. Given that the syntax of a representation is what determines its causal role in thought, RTM thereby serves to connect the fact that mental processes are truth-preserving with the fact that they’re causal.

For instance, suppose a thinker believes that if John ran, then Mary swam. According to RTM, for a thinker to hold such a belief is for the thinker to stand in a certain computational relation to a mental representation that means if John ran, then Mary swam. Now suppose the thinker comes to believe that John ran, and as a result comes to believe that Mary swam. RTM has it that the causal relations between these thoughts hold in virtue of the syntactic form of the underlying mental representations. By picturing the mind as a “syntax-driven machine” (Fodor, 1987, p. 20), RTM thus promises to explain how the causal relations among thoughts can respect rational relations among their contents. It thereby provides a potentially promising reply to Descartes’ worry about how rationality could be exhibited by a mere machine. As Fodor puts it:

So we can now (maybe) explain how thinking could be both rational and mechanical. Thinking can be rational because syntactically specified operations can be truth preserving insofar as they reconstruct relations of logical form; thinking can be mechanical because Turing machines are machines. … [T]his really is a lovely idea and we should pause for a moment to admire it. Rationality is a normative property; that is, it’s one that a mental process ought to have. This is the first time that there has ever been a remotely plausible mechanical theory of the causal powers of a normative property. The first time ever. (2000, p. 29)

In Fodor’s view, it’s a major argument in favor of RTM that it promises an explanation of how mental processes can be truth-preserving (Fodor 1994, p. 9; 2000, p. 13), and a major strike against traditional empiricist and associationist theories that they offer no competing explanation (1998a, p. 10; 2000, pp. 15-18; 2003, pp. 90-94).

That it explains how truth-preserving mental processes could be realized causally is one of Fodor’s main arguments for RTM. In addition, Fodor argues that RTM provides the only hope of explaining the so-called “productivity” and “systematicity” of thought (Fodor 1987, 1998a, 2008). Roughly, productivity is the feature of our minds whereby there is no upper bound to the number of thoughts we can entertain. We can think that the dog is on the deck; that the dog, which chased the squirrel, is on the deck; that the dog, which chased the squirrel, which foraged for nuts, is on the deck; and so on, indefinitely. There are, of course, thoughts whose contents are so long that other factors prevent us from entertaining them. But abstracting away from such performance limitations, it seems that a theory of our conceptual competence must account for such productivity. Thought also appears to be systematic, in the following sense: a mind that is capable of entertaining a certain thought, p, is also capable of entertaining logical permutations of p. For example, minds that can entertain the thought that the book is to the left of the cup can also entertain the thought that the cup is to the left of the book. Although it’s perhaps possible that there could be minds that  do not exhibit such systematicity—a possibility denied by some, for example, Evans (1982) and Peacocke (1992)—it at least appears to be an empirical fact that all minds do.

In Fodor’s view, RTM is the only theory of mind that can explain productivity and systematicity. According to RTM, mental states have internal, constituent structure, and the content of mental states is determined by the content of their constituents and how those constituents are put together. Given a finite base of primitive representations, our capacity to entertain endlessly many thoughts can be explained by positing a finite number of rules for combining representations, which can be applied endlessly many times in the course of constructing complex thoughts. RTM offers a similar explanation of systematicity. The reason that a mind that can entertain the thought that the book is to the left of the cup can also entertain the thought that the cup is to the left of the book, is that these thoughts are built up out of the same constituents, using the same rules of combination. RTM thus explains productivity and systematicity because it claims that mental states are relations to representations that have syntactic structure and a compositional semantics. One of Fodor’s main arguments against alternative, connectionist theories is that they fail to account for such features (Fodor and Pylyshyn 1988, Fodor 1998b, chs. 9 and10).

A further argument Fodor offers in favor of RTM is that successful empirical theories of various non-demonstrative inferences presuppose a system of internal representations in which such inferences are carried out. For instance, standard theories of visual perception attempt to explain how a percept is constructed on the basis of the physical information available and the visual system’s built-in assumptions about the environment, or “natural constraints” (Pylyshyn 2003). Similarly, theories of sentence perception and comprehension require that the language system be able to represent distinct properties (for instance, acoustic, phonological, and syntactic properties) of a single utterance (Fodor et al. 1974). Both sorts of theories require that there be a system of representations capable of representing various properties and serving as the medium in which such inferences are carried out. Indeed, Fodor sometimes claims that the best reason for endorsing RTM is that “some version or other of RTM underlies practically all current psychological research on mentation, and our best science is ipso facto our best estimate of what there is and what it’s made of” (Fodor 1987, p. 17). Fodor’s The Language of Thought (1975) is the locus classicus of this style of argument.

5. Content and Concepts

Even if taking mental processes to be computational shows how rational relations between thoughts can be realized by purely casual relations among symbols in the brain, as RTM suggests, there’s still the question of how those symbols come to have their meaning or content. Ever since Brentano, philosophers have worried about how to integrate intentionality into the physical world, a worry that has famously led some to accept the “baselessness of intentional idioms and the emptiness of a science of intention” (Quine 1960, p. 221). Part of Fodor’s task is thus to show, contra his eliminativist, instrumentalist, and interpretationist opponents, that a plausible naturalistic account of intentionality can be given. Much of his work over the last two decades or so has focused on this representational (as opposed to the computational) component of RTM (Fodor 1987, 1994, 1998; Fodor and Lepore 1992, 2002).

Back in the 1960s and early 1970s, Fodor endorsed a version of so-called “inferential role semantics” (IRS), according to which the content of a representation is (partially) determined by the inferential connections that it bears to other representations. To take two hoary examples, IRS has it that “bachelor” gets its meaning, in part, by bearing an inferential connection to “unmarried,” and “kill” gets its meaning, in part, by bearing an inferential connection to “die”. Such inferential connections hold, on Fodor’s early view, because “bachelor” and “kill” have complex structure at the level at which they’re semantically interpreted— that is, they have the structure exhibited by the phrases “unmarried adult male” and “cause to die” (Katz and Fodor 1963). In terms of concepts, the claim is that the concept BACHELOR has the internal structure exhibited by ‘UNMARRIED ADULT MALE’, and the concept KILL has the internal structure exhibited by ‘CAUSE TO DIE’. (This article follows the convention of writing the names of concepts in capitals and writing the meanings of concepts in italics.)

Eventually, Fodor came to think that there are serious objections to IRS. Some of these objections were based on his own experimental work in psycholinguistics, which he took to provide strong evidence against the existence of complex lexical structure. Understanding a sentence does not seem to involve recovering the decompositions of the lexical items they contain (Fodor et al. 1975). Thinking the thought CATS CHASE MICE doesn’t seem to be harder than thinking CATS CATCH MICE, whereas the former ought to be more complex if ‘chase’ can be decomposed into a structure that includes ‘intends to catch’ (Fodor et al. 1980). As Fodor recently quipped, “[i]t’s an iron law of cognitive science that, in experimental environments, definitions always behave exactly as though they weren’t there” (1998a, p. 46). (For an alternative interpretation of this evidence, see Jackendoff (1983, pp. 125-127; 1992, p. 49), and Miller and Johnson-Laird (1976, p. 328).) In part because of the lack of evidence for decompositional structure, Fodor at one point seriously considered the view the inferential connections among lexical items may hold in virtue of inference rules, or “meaning postulates,” which renders IRS consistent with a denial of the claim that lexical items are semantically structured (1975, pp. 148-152).

However, Fodor ultimately became convinced of Quine’s influential arguments against meaning postulates, and more generally, Quine’s view that there is no principled distinction between those connections that are “constitutive” of the meaning of a concept and those that are “merely collateral”. Quinean considerations, Fodor argues, show that IRS theorists should not appeal to meaning postulates (Fodor 1998a, appendix 5a). Moreover, Quine’s confirmation holism suggests that the epistemic properties of a concept are potentially connected to the epistemic properties of every other concept, which, according to Fodor, suggests that IRS inevitably leads to semantic holism, the claim that all of a concept’s inferential connections are constitutive. But Fodor argues that semantic holism is unacceptable, since it’s incompatible with the claim that concepts are shareable. As he recently put it, “since practically everybody has some eccentric beliefs about practically everything, holism has it that nobody shares any concepts with anybody else” (2004, p. 35; see also Fodor and Lepore 1992, Fodor 1998a). This implication would undermine the possibility of genuine intentional generalizations in psychology, which require that concepts are shared across both individuals and different time-slices of the same individual.

Proponents of IRS might reply to these concerns about semantic holism by claiming that only some inferential connections are concept-constitutive. But Fodor suggests that the only way to distinguish the constitutive connections from the rest is to endorse an analytic/synthetic distinction, which in his view Quine has given us good reason to reject (for example, 1990, p. x, 1998a, p. 71, 1998b, pp. 32-33). Fodor’s Quinean point, ultimately, is that theorists should be reluctant to claim that there are certain beliefs people must hold, or inferences they must accept, in order to possess a concept. For thinkers can apparently have any number of arbitrarily strange beliefs involving some concept, consistent with them sharing that concept with others. As Fodor puts it:

[P]eople can have radically false theories and really crazy views, consonant with our understanding perfectly well, thank you, which false views they have and what radically crazy things it is that they believe. Berkeley thought that chairs are mental, for Heaven’s sake! Which are we to say he lacked, the concept MENTAL or the concept CHAIR? (1987, p. 125) (For further reflections along similar lines, see Williamson 2007.)

Without an analytic/synthetic distinction, any attempt to answer such a question would be unprincipled. Rejecting the analytic/synthetic distinction thus leads Fodor to reject any ‘molecularist’ attempt to specify only certain inferences or beliefs as concept-constitutive. On Fodor’s view, then, proponents of IRS are faced with two unequally satisfying options: they can agree with Quine about the analytic/synthetic distinction, but at the cost of endorsing semantic holism and its unpalatable consequences for the viability of intentionality psychology; or they can deny semantic holism at the cost of endorsing an analytic/synthetic distinction, which Fodor thinks nobody knows how to draw.

It’s worth pointing out that Fodor doesn’t think that confirmation holism, all by itself, rules out the existence of certain “local” semantic connections that hold as a matter of empirical fact. Indeed, contemporary battles over the existence of such connections are now taking place on explanatory grounds that involve delicate psychological and linguistic considerations that are fairly far removed from the epistemological considerations that motivated the positivists. For instance, there are the standard convergences in people’s semantic-cum-conceptual intuitions, which cry out for an empirical explanation. Although some argue that such convergences are best explained by positing analyticities ( Grice and Strawson 1956, Rey 2005), Fodor argues that all such intuitions can be accounted for by an appeal to Quinean “centrality” or “one-criterion” concepts (Fodor 1998a, pp. 80-86). There are also considerations in linguistics that bear on the existence of an empirically grounded analytic/synthetic distinction including issues concerning the syntactic and semantic analyses of ‘causative’ verbs, the ‘generativity’ of the lexicon, and the acquisition of certain elements of syntax. Fodor has engaged linguists on a number of such fronts, arguing against the proposals of Jackendoff (1992), Pustejovsky (1995), Pinker (1989), Hale and Keyser (1993), and others, defending the Quinean line (see Fodor 1998a, pp. 49-56, and Fodor and Lepore 2002, chs. 5-6; see Pustejovsky 1998 and Hale and Keyser 1999 for rejoinders). Fodor’s view is that all of the relevant empirical facts about minds and language can be explained without any analytic connections, but merely deeply believed ones, precisely as Quine argued.

Fodor sees a common error to all versions of IRS because they are trying to tie semantics to epistemology. Moreover, the problems plaguing IRS ultimately arise as a result of its attempt to connect a theory of meaning with certain epistemic conditions of thinkers. A further argument against such views, Fodor claims, is that such epistemic conditions do not compose, since they violate the compositionality constraint that is required for an explanation of productivity and systematicity (see above). For instance, if one believes that brown cows are dangerous, then the concept BROWN COW will license the inference ‘BROWN COW → DANGEROUS’; but this inference is not determined by the inferential roles of BROWN and COW, which it ought to be if meaning-constituting inferences are compositional (Fodor and Lepore 2002, ch.1; for discussion and criticism, see, for example, Block 1993, Boghossian 1993, and Rey 1993).

Another epistemic approach, as favored by many psychologists, appeals to “prototypes”. According to these theories, lexical concepts are internally structured and specify the prototypical features of their instances, that is, the features that they’re instances tend to (but need not) have (for examples see Rosch and Mervis 1975). Prototype theories are epistemic accounts because having a concept is a matter of knowing the features of its prototypical instances. Given this, Fodor argues that prototype theories are in danger of violating compositionality. For example, knowing what prototypical pets ('dogs') are like and what prototypical fish ('trout') are like does not guarantee that you know what prototypical pet fish ('goldfish') are like (Fodor 1998a, pp. 102-108, Fodor and Lepore 2002, ch. 2). Since compositionality is required in order to explain the productivity and systematicity of thought, and prototype structures do not compose, it follows that concepts don’t have prototype structure. According to Fodor, the same kind argument applies to theories that take concepts to be individuated by certain recognitional capacities. Fodor argues that since recognitional capacities don’t compose, but concepts do, “there are no recognitional concepts—not even red” (Fodor 1998b, ch. 4). This argument has been disputed by a number of philosophers, for example, Horgan (1998), Recanati (2002), and Prinz (2002).

Fodor thus rejects all theories that individuate concepts in terms of their epistemic relations and their internal structure, and instead defends what he calls “informational atomism,” according to which lexical concepts are unstructured atoms whose content is determined by certain informational relations they bear to phenomena in the environment. In claiming that lexical concepts are internally unstructured, Fodor’s informational atomism is meant to respect the evidence and arguments against decomposition, definitions, prototypes, and the like. In claiming that none of the epistemic properties of concepts are constitutive, Fodor is endorsing what he sees as the only alternative to a molecularist and holistic theory of content, neither of which he takes to be viable. By separating epistemology from semantics in this way, Fodor’s theory places virtually no constraints on what a thinker must believe in order to possess a particular concept. For instance, what determines whether a mind possesses DOG isn’t whether it has certain beliefs about dogs, but rather whether it possess an internal symbol that stands in the appropriate mind-world relation to the property of being a dog. Rather than talking about concepts as they figure in beliefs, inferences, or other epistemic states, Fodor instead talks of mere “tokenings” of concepts, where for him these are internal symbols that need not play any specific role in cognition. In his view, this is the only way for a theory of concepts to respect Quinean strictures on analyticity and constitutive conceptual connections. Indeed, Fodor claims that by denying that “the grasp of any interconceptual relations is constitutive of concept possession,” informational atomism allows us to “see why Quine was right about there not being an analytic/synthetic distinction” (Fodor 1998a, p. 71).

Fodor’s most explicit characterization of the mind-world relation that determines content is his “asymmetry dependency” theory (1987, 1990). According to this theory, the concept DOG means dog because dogs cause tokenings of DOG, and non-dogs causing tokenings of DOG is asymmetrically dependent upon dogs causing DOG. In other words, non-dogs wouldn’t cause tokenings of DOG unless dogs cause tokenings of DOG, but not vice versa. This is Fodor’s attempt to meet Brentano’s challenge of providing a naturalistic sufficient condition for a symbol to have a meaning. Not surprisingly, many objections have been raised to Fodor’s asymmetric dependency theory (seethe papers in Loewer in Rey 1991), and it’s interesting to note that the theory has all but disappeared from his more recent work on concepts and content, in which he simply claims that “meaning is information (more or less)”, without specifying the nature of the relations that determine the informational content of a symbol (1998a, p. 12).

Regardless of the exact nature of the content-determining laws, it’s important to see that Fodor is not claiming that the epistemic properties of concept are irrelevant from the perspective of a theory of concepts. For such epistemic properties are what sustain the laws that “lock” concepts onto properties in the environment. For instance, it is only because thinkers know a range of facts about dogs—what they look like, that they bark, and so forth—that their dog-tokens are lawfully connected to the property of being a dog. Knowledge of such facts plays a causal role in fixing the content of DOG, but on Fodor’s view they don’t play a constitutive one. For while such epistemic properties mediate the connection between tokens of DOG and dogs, this a mere “engineering” fact about us, which has no implications for the metaphysics of concepts or concept possession (1998a, p. 78). As Fodor puts it, “it’s that your mental structures contrive to resonate to doghood, not how your mental structures contrive to resonate to doghood, that is constitutive of concept possession” (1998a, p. 76). Although the internal relations that DOG bears to other concepts and to percepts are what mediate the connection between DOG and dogs, such relations are not concept-constitutive.

Fodor’s theory is thus a version of semantic externalism, according to which the meaning of a concept is exhausted by its reference. There are two well-known problems with any such theory: Frege cases, which putatively show that concepts that have different meanings can nevertheless be referentially identical; and Twin cases, which putatively show that concepts that are referentially distinct can nevertheless have the same meaning. Together, Frege cases and Twin cases suggest that meaning and reference are independent in both directions. Fodor has had much to say about each kind of case, and his views on both have changed over the years.

If conceptual content is exhausted by reference, then two concepts with the same referent ought to be identical in content. As Fodor puts it, “if meaning is information, then coreferential representations must be synonyms” (1998a, p. 12). But, prima facie, this is false. For as Frege pointed out, it’s easy to generate substitution failures involving coreferential concepts: “John believes that Hesperus is beautiful” may be true while “John believes that Phosphorus is beautiful” is false; “Thales believes that there’s water in the cup” may be true while “Thales believes that there’s H2O in the cup” is false; and so on. Since it’s widely believed that substitution tests are tests for synonymy, such cases suggest that coreferential concepts aren’t synonyms. In light of this, Fregeans introduce a layer of meaning in addition to reference that allows for a semantic distinction between coreferential but distinct concepts. On their view, coreferential concepts are distinct because they have different senses, or “modes of presentation” of a referent, which Fregeans typically individuate in terms of conceptual role (Peacocke 1992).

In one of Fodor’s important early articles on the topic, “Methodological Solipsism Considered as a Research Strategy in Cognitive Psychology” (1980), he argued that psychological explanations depend upon opaque taxonomies of mental states, and that we must distinguish the content of coreferential terms for the purposes of psychological explanation. At that time Fodor thus allowed for a kind of content that’s determined by the internal roles of symbols, which he speculated might be “reconstructed as aspects of form, at least insofar as appeals to content figure in accounts of the mental causation of behavior” (1981, p. 240). However, once he adopted a purely externalist semantics (Fodor 1994), Fodor could no longer allow for a notion of content determined by such internal relations. If conceptual content is exhausted by reference, as informational semantics has it, then there cannot be a semantic distinction between coreferential but distinct concepts.

In later work Fodor thus proposes to distinguish coreferential concepts purely syntactically, and argues that we treat modes of presentation (MOPs) as the representational vehicles of thoughts (Fodor 1994, 1998a, 2008). For instance, while Thales’ ‘water-MOP’ has the same content as his ‘H2O-MOP’ (were he to have one), they are nevertheless syntactically distinct (for example, only the latter has hydrogen as a constituent), and will thus differ in the causal and inferential relations they enter into. In taking MOPs to be the syntactically-individuated vehicles of thought, Fodor’s treatment of Frege cases serves to connect his theory of concepts with RTM. As he puts it:

It’s really the basic idea of RTM that Turing’s story about the nature of mental processes provides the very candidates for MOP-hood that Frege’s story about the individuation of mental states independently requires. If that’s true, it’s about the nicest thing that ever happened to cognitive science (1998a, p. 22).

An interesting consequence of this treatment is that people’s behavior in Frege cases can no longer be given an intentional explanation. Instead, such behavior is explained at the level of syntactically-individuated representations If, as Fodor suggested in his early work (1981), psychological explanations standardly depend upon opaque taxonomies of mental states, then this treatment of Frege cases would threaten the need for intentional explanations in psychology. In an attempt to block this threat, Fodor (1994) argues that Frege cases are in fact quite rare, and can be understood as exceptions rather than counterexamples to psychological laws couched in terms of broad content. The viability of a view that combines a syntactic treatment of Frege cases with RTM has been the focus of a fair amount of recent literature; see Arjo (1997), Aydede (1998), Aydede and Robins (2001), Brook and Stainton (1997), Rives (2009), Segal (1997), and Schneider (2005).

Let us now turn to Fodor’s treatment of Twin cases. Putnam (1975) asks us to imagine a place, Twin Earth, which is just like earth except the stuff Twin Earthians pick out with the concept water is not H2O but some other chemical compound XYZ. Consider Oscar and Twin Oscar, who are both entertaining the thought there’s water in the glass. Since they’re physical duplicates, they’re type-identical with respect to everything mental inside their heads. However, Oscar’s thought is true just in case there’s H2O in the glass, whereas Twin Oscar’s thought is true just in case there’s XYZ in the glass. A purely externalist semantics thus seems to imply that Oscar and Twin Oscar’s WATER concepts are of distinct types, despite the fact that Oscar and Twin Oscar are type-identical with respect to everything mental inside their heads. Supposing that intentional laws are couched in terms of broad content, it would follow that Oscar’s and Twin Oscar’s water-directed behavior don’t fall under the same intentional laws.

Such consequence have seemed unacceptable to many, including Fodor, who in his book Psychosemantics (1987) argues that we need a notion of “narrow” content that allows us to account for the fact that Oscar’s and Twin-Oscar’s mental states will have the same causal powers despite differences in their environments. Fodor there defends a “mapping” notion of narrow content, inspired by David Kaplan’s work on demonstratives, according to which the narrow content of a concept is a function from contexts to broad contents (1987, ch. 2). The narrow content of Oscar’s and Twin Oscar’s concept WATER is thus a function that maps Oscar’s context onto the broad content H2O and Twin Oscar’s context onto the broad content XYZ. Such narrow content is shared because Oscar and Twin Oscar are computing the same function. It was Fodor’s hope that this notion of narrow content would allow him to respect the standard Twin-Earth intuitions, while at the same time claim that the intentional properties relevant for psychological explanation supervene on facts internal to thinkers.

However, in The Elm and the Expert (1994) Fodor gives up on the notion of narrow content altogether, and argues that intentional psychology need not worry about Twin cases. Such cases, Fodor claims, only show that it’s conceptually (not nomologically) possible that broad content doesn’t supervene on facts internal to thinkers. One thus can not appeal to such cases to “argue against the nomological supervenience of broad content on computation since, as far as anybody knows … chemistry allows nothing that is as much like water as XYZ is supposed to be except water” (1994, p. 28). So since Putnam’s Twin Earth is nomologically impossible, and “empirical theories are responsible only to generalizations that hold in nomologically possible worlds,” Twin cases pose no threat to a broad content psychology (1994, p. 29). If it turned out that such cases did occur, then, according to Fodor, the generalizations missed by a broad content psychology would be purely accidental (1994, pp. 30-33). Fodor’s settled view is thus that Twin cases, like Frege cases, cases are fully compatible with an intentional psychology that posits only two dimensions to concepts: syntactically-individuated internal representations and broad contents.

6. Nativism

In The Language of Thought (1975), Fodor argued not only in favor of RTM but also in favor of the much more controversial view that all lexical concepts are innate. Fodor’s argument starts with the noncontroversial claim that in order to learn a concept one must learn its meaning, or content. Empiricist models of concept learning typically assume that thinkers learn a concept on the basis of experience by confirming a hypothesis about its meaning. But Fodor argues that such models will apply only to those concepts whose meanings are semantically complex. For instance, if the meaning of BACHELOR is unmarried, adult, male, then a thinker can learn bachelor by confirming the hypothesis that it applies to things that are unmarried, adult, and male. Of course, being able to formulate this hypothesis requires that one possess the concepts UNMARRIED, ADULT, and MALE. The empiricist model thus will not apply to primitive concepts that lack internal structure that can be mentally represented in this way. For instance, one can not formulate the hypothesis that red things fall under RED unless one already has RED, for the concept RED is a constituent of that very hypothesis. Primitive concepts like RED, therefore, must not be learned and must be innate. If, as Fodor argues, all lexical concepts are primitive, then it follows that all lexical concepts are innate (1975, ch. 2). Fodor’s claim is not that people are born possessing lexical concepts; experience must play a role on any account of concept acquisition (just as it does on any account of language acquisition). Fodor’s claim is that concepts are not learned on the basis of experience, but rather are triggered by it. As Fodor sometimes puts it, the relation between experience and concept acquisition is brute-causal, not rational or evidential (Fodor 1981b).

Of course, most theories of concepts—such as inferential role and prototype theories, discussed above—assume that many lexical concepts have some kind of internal structure. In fact, theorists are sometimes explicit that their motivation for positing complex lexical structure is to reduce the number of primitives in the lexicon. As Ray Jackendoff says:

Nearly everyone thinks that learning anything consists of constructing it from previously known parts, using previously known means of combination. If we trace the learning process back and ask where the previously known parts came from, and their previously know parts came from, eventually we have to arrive at a point where the most basic parts are not learned: they are given to the learner genetically, by virtue of the character of brain development. … Applying this view to lexical learning, we conclude that lexical concepts must have a compositional structure, and that the word learner’s [functional]-mind is putting meanings together from smaller parts (2002, 334). (See also Levin and Pinker 1991, p. 4.)

It’s worth stressing that while those in the empiricist tradition typically assume that the primitives are sensory concepts, those who posit complex lexical structure need not commit themselves to any such claim. Rather, they may simply assume that very few lexical items are not decomposable, and deal with the issue of primitives on a case by case basis, as Jackendoff (2002) does. In fact, many of the (apparent) primitives appealed to in the literature—for example, EVENT, THING, STATE, CAUSE, and so forth—are quite abstract and thus not ripe for an empiricist treatment.

In any case, Fodor is led to adopt informational atomism, in part, because he isn’t persuaded by the evidence that lexical concepts have any structure, decompositional or otherwise. He thus does not think that appealing to lexical structure provides an adequate reply to his argument for concept nativism (Fodor 1981b, 1998a, Fodor and Lepore 2002). If lexical concepts are primitive, and primitive concepts are unlearned, then lexical concepts are unlearned.

In his book Concepts: Where Cognitive Science Went Wrong (1998a), Fodor worries about whether his earlier view is adequate. In particular, he’s concerned about whether it has the resources to explain questions such as why it is experiences with doorknobs that trigger the concept DOORKNOB:

[T]here’s a further constraint that whatever theory of concepts we settle on should satisfy: it must explain why there is so generally a content relation between the experience that eventuates in concept attainment and the concept that the experience eventuates in attaining. … [A]ssuming that primitive concepts are triggered, or that they’re ‘caught’, won’t account for their content relation to their causes; apparently only induction will. But primitive concepts can’t be induced; to suppose that they are is circular. (1998a, p. 132

Fodor’s answer to this worry involves a metaphysical claim about the nature of the properties picked out by most of our lexical concepts. In particular, he claims that it’s constitutive of these properties that our minds “lock” to them as a result of experience with their stereotypical instances. As Fodor puts it, being a doorknob is just “being the kind of thing that our kinds of minds (do or would) lock to from experience with instances of the doorknob stereotype” (1998a, p. 137). By making such properties mind-dependent in this way, Fodor thus provides a metaphysical reply to his worry above: there need not be a cognitive or evidential relation between our experiences with doorknobs and our acquisition of DOORKNOB, for being a doorknob just is the property that our minds lock to as a result of experiencing stereotypical instances of doorknobs. Fodor sums up his view as follows:

[I]f the locking story about concept possession and the mind-dependence story about the metaphysics of doorknobhood are both true, then the kind of nativism about doorknob that an informational atomist has to put up with is perhaps not one of concepts but of mechanisms. That consequence may be some consolation to otherwise disconsolate Empiricists. (1998a, p. 142)

In his recent book, LOT 2: The Language of Thought Revisited (2008), Fodor extends his earlier discussions of concept nativism. Whereas his previous argument turned on the empirical claim that lexical concepts are internally unstructured, Fodor now says that this claim is “superfluous”: “What I should have said is that it’s true and a priori that the whole notion of concept learning is per se confused” (2008, p. 130). Fodor thus argues that even patently complex concepts, such as GREEN OR TRIANGULAR, are unlearnable. Learning this concept would require confirming the hypothesis that the things that fall under it are either green or triangular. However, Fodor says:

[T]he inductive evaluation of that hypothesis itself requires (inter alia) bringing the property green or triangular before the mind as such. You can’t represent something as green or triangular unless have the concepts GREEN, OR, and TRIANGULAR. Quite generally, you can’t represent anything as such as such unless you already have the concept such and such. … This conclusion is entirely general; it doesn’t matter whether the target concept is primitive (like green) or complex (like GREEN OR TRIANGULAR). (2008, p. 139)

Fodor’s diagnosis of this problem is that standard learning models wrongly assume that acquiring a concept is a matter of acquiring beliefs Instead, Fodor suggests that “beliefs are constructs out of concepts, not the other way around,” and that the failure to recognize this is what leads to the above circularity (2008, pp. 139-140; see also Fodor’s debate with Piaget in Piattelli-Palmarini, 1980).

Fodor’s story about concept nativism in LOT 2 runs as follows: although no concepts—not even complex ones—are learned, concept acquisition nevertheless involves inductive generalizations. We acquire concepts as a result of experiencing their stereotypical instances, and learning a stereotype is an inductive process. Of course, if concepts were stereotypes then it would follow that concept acquisition would be an inductive process. But, Fodor says, concepts can’t be stereotypes since stereotypes violate compositionality (see above). Instead, Fodor suggests that learning a stereotype is a stage in the acquisition of a concept. His picture thus looks like this (2008, p. 151):

Initial state → (P1) → stereotype formation → (P2) → locking (= concept attainment).

Why think that P1 is an inductive process? Fodor says there are “well-known empirical results suggesting that even very young infants are able to recognize and respond to statistical regularities in their environments,” and “a genetically endowed capacity for statistical induction would make sense if stereotype formation is something that minds are frequently employed to do” (2008, p. 153). What makes this picture consistent with Fodor’s claim that “there can’t be any such thing as concept learning” (p. 139) is that he does not take P2 to be an inferential or intentional process (pp. 154-155). What kind of process is it? Here, Fodor doesn’t have much to say, other than it’s the “kind of thing that our sort of brain tissue just does”: “Psychology gets you from the initial state to P2; then neurology takes over and gets you the rest of the way to concept attainment” (p. 152). So, again, Fodor’s ultimate story about concept nativism is consistent with the view, as he puts it in Concepts, that “maybe there aren’t any innate ideas after all” (1998a, p. 143). Instead, there are innate mechanisms, which he now claims take us from the acquisition of stereotypes to the acquisition of concepts.

7. Modularity

In his influential book, The Modularity of Mind (1983), Fodor argues that the mind contains a number of highly specialized, “modular” systems, whose operations are largely independent from each other and from the “central” system devoted to reasoning, belief fixation, decision making, and the like. In that book, Fodor was particularly interested in defending a modular view of perception against the so-called “New Look” psychologists and philosophers (for example, Bruner, Kuhn, Goodman), who took cognition to be more or less continuous with perception. Whereas New Look theorists focused on evidence suggesting various top-down effects in perceptual processing (ways in which what people believe and expect can affect what they see), Fodor was impressed by evidence from the other direction suggesting that perceptual processes lack access to such “background” information. Perceptual illusions provide a nice illustration. In the famous Müller-Lyer illusion (Figure 1), for instance, the top line looks longer than the bottom line even though they’re identical in length.


Figure 1. The Müller-Lyer Illusion

Standard explanations of the illusion appeal to certain background assumptions the visual system is making, which effectively ‘override’ the fact that the retinal projections are identical in length. However, as Fodor pointed out, if knowing that the two lines are identical in length does not change the fact that one looks longer than the other, then clearly perceptual processes don’t have access to all of the information available to the perceiver. Thus, there must be limits on how much information is available to the visual system for use in perceptual inferences. In other words, vision must be in some interesting sense modular. The same goes for other sensory/input systems, and, on Fodor’s view, certain aspects of language processing.

Fodor spells out a number of characteristic features of modules. That knowledge of an illusion doesn’t make the illusion go away illustrates one of their central features, namely, that they are informationally encapsulated. Fodor says:

[T]he claim that input systems are informationally encapsulated is equivalent to the claim that the data that can bear on the confirmation of perceptual hypotheses includes, in the general case, considerably less that the organism may know. That is, the confirmation function for input systems does not have access to all the information that the organism internally represents. (1983, p. 69)

In addition, modules are supposed to be domain specific, in the sense that they’re restricted in the sorts of representations (such as visual, auditory, or linguistic) that can serve as their inputs (1983, pp. 47-52). They’re also mandatory. For instance, native English speakers cannot hear utterances of English as mere noise (“You all know what Swedish and Chinese sound like; what does English sound like?” 1983, p. 54), and people with normal vision and their eyes open cannot help but see the 3-D objects in front of them. In general, modules “approximate the condition so often ascribed to reflexes: they are automatically triggered by the stimuli that they apply to” (1983, pp. 54-55). Not only are modular processes domain-specific and out of our voluntary control, they’re also exceedingly fast. For instance, subjects can “shadow” speech (repeat what is heard when it’s heard) with a latency of about 250 milliseconds, and match a description to a picture with 96% accuracy when exposed for a mere 167 milliseconds (1983, pp. 61-64). In addition, modules have shallow outputs, in the sense that the information they carry is simple, or constrained in some way, which is required because otherwise the processing required to generate them couldn’t be encapsulated. As Fodor says, “if the visual system can deliver news about protons, then the likelihood that visual analysis is informationally encapsulated is negligible” (1983, p. 87). Fodor tentatively suggests that the visual system delivers as outputs “basic” perceptual categories (Rosch et al. 1976) such as dog or chair, although others take shallow outputs to be altogether non-conceptual (see Carruthers 2006, p. 4). In addition to these features, Fodor also suggests that modules are associated with fixed neural architecture (1983, pp. 98-99), exhibit characteristic and specific breakdown patterns (1983, pp. 99-100), and have an ontogeny that exhibits a characteristic pace and sequencing (1983, pp. 100-101).

On Fodor’s view, although sensory systems are modular, the “central” systems underlying belief fixation, planning, decision-making, and the like, are not. The latter exhibit none of the characteristic features associated with modules since they are domain-general, unencapsulated, under our voluntary control, slow, and not associated with fixed neural structures. Fodor draws attention, in particular, to two distinguishing features of central systems: they’re isotropic, in the sense that “in principle, any of one’s cognitive commitments (including, of course, the available experiential data) is relevant to the (dis)confirmation of any new belief” (2008, p. 115); and they’re Quinean, in the sense that they compute over the entirety of one’s belief system, as when one settles on the simplest, most conservative overall belief—as Fodor puts it, “the degree of confirmation assigned to any given hypothesis is sensitive to properties of the entire belief system” (1983, p. 107). Fodor’s picture of mental architecture is one in which there are a number of informationally encapsulated modules that process the outputs of transducer systems, and then generate representations that are integrated in a non-modular central system. The Fodorean mind is thus essentially a big general-purpose computer, with a number of domain-specific computers out near the edges that feed into it.

Fodor’s work on modularity has been criticized on a number of fronts. Empiricist philosophers and psychologists are typically quite happy with the claim that the central system is domain-general, but have criticized Fodor’s claim that input systems are modular (see Prinz 2006 for a recent overview of such criticisms). Fodor’s work has also been attacked from the other direction, by those who share his rationalist and nativist sympathies. Most notably, evolutionary psychologists reject Fodor’s claim that there must be a non-modular system responsible for integrating modular outputs, and argue instead that the mind is nothing but a collection of modular systems (see, Barkow, Cosmides, and Tooby (1992), Carruthers (2006), Pinker (1997), and Sperber (2002)). According to such “massive modularity” theorists, what Fodor calls the “central” system is in fact built up out of a number of domain-specific modules, for example, modules devoted to common-sense reasoning about physics, biology, psychology, and the detection of cheaters, to name a few prominent examples from the literature. Evolutionary psychologists also claim that these central modules are adaptations, that is, products of selection pressures that faced our hominid ancestors; see Pinker (1997) for an introduction to evolutionary psychology, and Carruthers (2006) for what is perhaps the most sophisticated defense of massive modularity to date.

That Fodor is a nativist might lead one to believe that he is sympathetic to applying adaptationist reasoning to the human mind. This would be a mistake. Fodor has long been skeptical of the idea that the mind is a product of natural selection, and in his book The Mind Doesn’t Work That Way (2001) he replies to a number of arguments purporting to show that it must be. For instance, evolutionary psychologists claim that the mind must be “reverse engineered”: in order to figure out how it works, we must know what its function is; and in order to know what its function is we must know what it was selected for. Fodor rejects this latter inference, and claims that natural selection is not required in order to underwrite claims about the teleology of the mind. For the notion of function relevant for psychology might be synchronic, not diachronic: “You might think, after all, that what matters in understanding the mind is what ours do now, not what our ancestors’ did some millions of years ago” (1998b, p. 209). Indeed, in general, one does not need to know about the evolutionary history of a system in order to make inferences about its function:

[O]ne can often make a pretty shrewd guess what an organ is for on the basis of entirely synchronic considerations. One might thus guess that hands are for grasping, eyes for seeing, or even that minds are for thinking, without knowing or caring much about their history of selection. Compare Pinker (1997, p. 38): “psychologists have to look outside psychology if they want to explain what the parts of the mind are for.” Is this true? Harvey didn’t have to look outside physiology to explain what the heart is for. It is, in particular, morally certain that Harvey never read Darwin. Likewise, the phylogeny of bird flight is still a live issue in evolutionary theory. But, I suppose, the first guy to figure out what birds use their wings for lived in a cave. (2000, p. 86)

Fodor’s point is that even if one grants that natural selection underwrites teleological claims about the mind, it doesn’t follow that in order to understand a psychological mechanism one must understand the selection pressures that led to it.

Evolutionary psychologists also argue that the adaptive complexity of the human mind requires that one treat it as a collection of adaptations. For natural selection is the only known explanation for adaptive complexity in the living world. Fodor replies that the complexity of the mind is irrelevant when it comes to determining whether it’s a product of natural selection:

[W]hat matters to the plausibility that the architecture of our minds is an adaptation is how much genotypic alternation would have been required for it to evolve from the mind of the nearest ancestral ape whose cognitive architecture was different from ours. … [I]t’s entirely possible that quite small neurological reorganizations could have effected wild psychological discontinuities between our minds and the ancestral ape’s. (2000, pp. 87-88)

Given that we don’t currently know whether small neurological changes in the brains of our ancestors led to large changes in their cognitive capacities, Fodor says, the appeal to adaptive complexity does not warrant the claim that our minds are the product of natural selection. In his latest book co-authored with Massimo Piattelli-Palmarini, What Darwin Got Wrong (2010), Fodor argues that selectional explanations in general are both decreasingly of interest in biology and, on further reflection, actually incoherent. Perhaps needless to say, this view has occasioned considerable controversy; for examples see Sober (forthcoming), Block and Kitcher (2010), and Godfrey-Smith (2010).

In The Mind Doesn’t Work That Way (2000), and also in LOT 2 (2008), Fodor reiterates and defends his claim that the central systems are non-modular, and connects this view to general doubts about the adequacy of RTM as a comprehensive theory of the human mind. One of the main jobs of the central system is the fixation of belief via abductive inferences, and Fodor argues that the fact that such inferences are isotropic and Quinean shows they cannot be realized in a modular system. These features render belief fixation a “holistic”, “global”, and “context-dependent” affair, which implies that it is not realized in a modular, informationally-encapsulated system. Moreover, given RTM’s commitment to the claim that computational processes are sensitive only to local properties of mental representations, these holistic features of central cognition would appear to fall outside of RTM’s scope (2000, chs. 2-3; 2008, ch. 4).

Consider, for instance, the simplicity of a belief. As Fodor says: “The thought that there will be no wind tomorrow significantly complicates your arrangements if you had intended to sail to Chicago, but not if your plan was to fly, drive, or walk there” (2000, p. 26). Whether or not a belief complicates a plan thus depends upon the beliefs involved in the plan—that is, the simplicity of a belief is one of its global, context-dependent properties. However, the syntactic properties of representations are local, in the sense that they supervene on their intrinsic, context-independent properties. To the extent that cognition involves global properties of representations, then, Fodor concludes that RTM cannot provide a model of how cognition works:

[A] cognitive science that provides some insight into the part of the mind that isn’t modular may well have to be different, root and branch, from the kind of syntactical account that Turing’s insights inspired. It is, to return to Chomsky’s way of talking, a mystery, not just a problem, how mental processes could be simultaneously feasible and abductive and mechanical. Indeed, I think that, as things now stand, this and consciousness look to be the ultimate mysteries about the mind. (2000, p. 99).

Thus, although Fodor has long championed RTM as the best theory of cognition available, he thinks that its application is limited to those portions of the mind that are modular. Needless to say, many disagree with Fodor’s assessment of the limits of RTM (see Carruthers (2003, 2006), Ludwig and Schneider (2008), and Pinker (2005)).

8. References and Further Reading

  • Arjo, Dennis (1996) “Sticking Up for Oedipus: Fodor on Intentional Generalizations and Broad Content,” Mind & Language 11: 231-235.
  • Aydede, Murat (1998) “Fodor on Concepts and Frege Puzzles,” Pacific Philosophical Quarterly 79: 289-294.
  • Aydede, Murat & Philip Robbins (2001) “Are Frege Cases Exceptions to Intentional Generalizations?” Canadian Journal of Philosophy 31: 1-22.
  • Barkow, Jerome, Cosmides, Leda, and Tooby, John (Eds.) The Adapted Mind. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Block, Ned (1993). “Holism, Hyper-Analyticity, and Hyper-Compositionality,” Philosophical Issues 3: 37-72.
  • Block, Ned and Philip Kitcher (2010) “Misunderstanding Darwin: Natural Selection’s Secular Critics Get it Wrong,” Boston Review (March/April).
  • Boghossian, Paul (1993). “Does Inferential Role Semantics Rest on a Mistake?” Philosophical Issues 3: 73-88.
  • Brook, Andrew and Robert Stainton (1997) “Fodor’s New Theory of Content and Computation,” Mind & Language 12: 459-474.
  • Carruthers, Peter (2003) “On Fodor’s Problem,” Mind & Language 18: 502-523.
  • Carruthers, Peter (2006) The Architecture of the Mind: Massive Modularity and the Flexibility of Thought. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Chomsky, Noam (1959) “A Review of B.F. Skinner’s Verbal Behavior,” Language 35: 26-58.
  • Evans, Gareth (1982) Varieties of Reference. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Fodor, Janet, Jerry Fodor, and Merril Garrett (1975) “The Psychological Unreality of Semantic Representations,” Linguistic Inquiry 4: 515-531.
  • Fodor, Jerry (1970) “Three Reasons for Not Deriving “Kill” from “Cause to Die”,” Linguistic Inquiry 1: 429-438.
  • Fodor, Jerry (1974) “Special Sciences (Or: The Disunity of Science as a Working Hypothesis)” Synthese 28:97-115.
  • Fodor, Jerry (1975) The Language of Thought. New York: Crowell.
  • Fodor, Jerry (1980) “Methodological Solipsism Considered as a Research Strategy in Cognitive Psychology,” Behavioral and Brain Sciences 3: 63-109. Reprinted in Fodor (1981a).
  • Fodor, Jerry (1981a) RePresentations: Philosophical Essays on the Foundations of Cognitive Science. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press
  • Fodor, Jerry (1981b) “The Present Status of the Innateness Controversy,” In Fodor (1981a).
  • Fodor, Jerry (1983) The Modularity of Mind. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Fodor, Jerry (1986) “Why Paramecia Don’t Have Mental Representations,” Midwest Studies in Philosophy 10: 3-23.
  • Fodor, Jerry (1987) Psychosemantics: The Problem of Meaning in the Philosophy of Mind. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Fodor, Jerry (1989) “Making mind matter more,” Philosophical Topics 67: 59-79.
  • Fodor, Jerry (1990) A Theory of Content and Other Essays. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Fodor, Jerry (1994) The Elm and the Expert: Mentalese and Its Semantics. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Fodor, Jerry (1998a) Concepts: Where Cognitive Science Went Wrong. New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Fodor, Jerry (1998b) In Critical Condition: Polemical Essays on Cognitive Science and the Philosophy of Mind. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Fodor, Jerry (2000) The Mind Doesn’t Work That Way: The Scope and Limits of Computational Psychology. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Fodor, Jerry (2003) Hume Variations. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Fodor, Jerry (2004) “Having Concepts: A Brief Refutation of the 20th Century,” Mind & Language 19: 29-47.
  • Fodor, Jerry, and Charles Chihara (1965) “Operationalism and Ordinary Language,” American Philosophical Quarterly 2: 281-295.
  • Fodor, Jerry, Thomas Bever, and Merrill Garrett (1974) The Psychology of Language: An Introduction to Psycholinguistics and Generative Grammar. New York: McGraw Hill.
  • Fodor, Jerry, Merril Garrett, Edward Walker, and Cornelia Parkes (1980) “Against Definitions,” Reprinted in Margolis and Laurence (1999).
  • Fodor, Jerry, and Zenon Pylyshyn (1988) “Connectionism and Cognitive Architecture: A Critical Analysis,” Cognition 28: 3-71.
  • Fodor, Jerry, and Ernest Lepore (1992) Holism: A Shopper’s Guide. Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Fodor, Jerry, and Ernest Lepore (2002) The Compositionality Papers. New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Fodor, Jerry, and Massimo Piattelli-Palmarini (2010) What Darwin Got Wrong. Farrar, Straus and Giroux.
  • Godfrey-Smith, Peter (2010) “It Got Eaten,” London Review of Books, 32 (13): 29-30.
  • Hale, Kenneth, and Samuel Jay Keyser (1993) “On Argument Structure and Lexical Expression of Syntactic Relations,” in K. Hale and S.J. Keyser (Eds.) The View From Building 20. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Hale, Kenneth, & Samuel Jay Keyser (1999) “A Response to Fodor and Lepore “Impossible Words?”” Linguistic Inquiry 30: 453–466.
  • Heil, John (2003). From An Ontological Point of View. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Horgan, Terrence (1998). “Recognitional Concepts and the Compositionality of Concept Possession,” Philosophical Issues 9: 27-33.
  • Jackendoff, R. (1983). Semantics and Cognition. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Jackendoff, R. (1992). Languages of the Mind. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Kim, Jaegwon (1993) Supervenience and Mind. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Loewer, Barry, and Georges Rey (Eds.) (1991). Meaning in Mind: Fodor and His Critics. Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Lowe, E.J. (2008) Personal Agency: The Metaphysics of Mind and Action. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Ludwig, Kirk, and Susan Schneider (2008) “Fodor’s Challenge to the Classical Computational Theory of Mind,” Mind & Language, 23, 123-143.
  • Melnyk, Andrew (2003) A Physicalist Manifesto: Thoroughly Modern Materialism. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Miller, George, and Johnson-Laird, Philip (1976). Language and Perception. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Peacocke, Christopher (1992) A Study of Concepts. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Piattelli-Palmarini, Massimo (1980) Language and Learning. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Pinker, Steven (1989) Learnability and Cognition. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Pinker, Steven (1997) How the Mind Works. New York: W. W. Norton & Company.
  • Pinker, Steven (2005) “So How Does the Mind Work?” Mind & Language 20: 1-24.
  • Prinz, Jesse (2002) Furnishing the Mind. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Prinz, Jesse (2006) “Is the Mind Really Modular?” In Stainton (Ed.) Contemporary Debates in Cognitive Science. Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Pustejovsky, James (1995) The Generative Lexicon. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Pustejovsky, J.(1998) “Generativity and Explanation in Semantics: A Reply to Fodor and Lepore” Linguistic Inquiry 29: 289-311.
  • Putnam, Hilary (1963) “Brains and Behavior”, reprinted in Putnam 1975b, pp. 325–341.
  • Putnam, Hilary (1967) “The Nature of Mental States”, reprinted in Putnam 1975b, 429–440.
  • Putnam, Hilary (1975) “The Meaning of ‘Meaning’,” Minnesota Studies in the Philosophy of Science 7: 131-193.
  • Putnam, Hilary (1975b) Mind, Language, and Reality, vol. 2. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Pylyshyn, Zenon (2003). Seeing and Visualizing. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Quine, W.V. (1960) Word and Object. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Recanati, François (2002) “The Fodorian Fallacy,” Analysis 62: 285-289.
  • Rey, Georges (1993) “Idealized Conceptual Roles,” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 53: 47-52.
  • Rey, Georges (2005) “Philosophical analysis as cognitive psychology,” In H. Cohen and C. Lefebvre (Eds.) Handbook of Categorization in Cognitive Science. Dordrecht: Elsevier.
  • Rives, Bradley (2009) “Concept Cartesianism, Concept Pragmatism, and Frege Cases,” Philosophical Studies 144: 211-238.
  • Rosch, Eleanor and Carolyn Mervis (1975) “Family Resemblances: Studies in the Internal Structure of Categories,” Cognitive Psychology 7: 573-605.
  • Rosch, Eleanor., Mervis, C., Gray, W., Johnson, D., and Boyes-Braem, P. (1976). “Basic Objects in Natural Categories,” Cognitive Psychology 8: 382–439.
  • Schneider, Susan (2005) “Direct Reference, Psychological Explanation, and Frege Cases,” Mind & Language 20: 423-447.
  • Segal, Gabriel (1997) “Content and Computation: Chasing the Arrows,” Mind & Language 12: 490-501.
  • Shoemaker, Sydney (2003) “Some Varieties of Functionalism,” In Shoemaker, Identity, Cause, and Mind, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Shoemaker, Sydney (2007) Physical Realization. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Sober, Eliot (forthcoming) “Selection-for: What Fodor and Piattelli-Palmarini Got Wrong,” Philosophy of Science.
  • Sperber, Daniel (2002) “In defense of massive modularity,” In Dupoux (Ed.) Language, Brain, and Cognitive Development. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Williamson, Timothy (2007). The Philosophy of Philosophy. Oxford: Blackwell.

Author Information

Bradley Rives
Indiana University of Pennsylvania
U. S. A.

Angélique de Saint Jean Arnauld d’Andilly (1624--1684)

Angélique de Saint-Jean Arnauld d’Andilly, an abbess of the convent of Port-Royal, was a leader of the intransigent party in the Jansenist movement.  A prolific author, Mère Angélique de Saint-Jean translated her determined opposition to civil and ecclesiastical authorities in the Jansenist controversy into a militant version of the neo-Augustinian philosophy she shared with other Jansenists.

Often citing the works of Saint Augustine himself, the abbess defends a dualistic metaphysics where mental reason opposes the physical senses and where supernatural faith opposes a reason ravaged by strong desires. Her moral theory presents an Augustinian account of virtue: the alleged natural virtues of the classical pagans are only disguised vices; authentic moral virtue can spring only from the theological virtues, infused through God’s sovereign grace.  Her epistemology criticizes the exercise of doubt in the religious domain, since such doubt often serves the interests of the civil and religious powers opposed to the Jansenist minority.  Power rather than a disinterested search for truth often characterizes dialogues inviting the minority to entertain doubts which will lead the minority to surrender its convictions to the stronger partner.  Strongly polemical in character, the writings of Mère Angélique de Saint-Jean detail a code of ethical resistance by which an embattled minority can refuse the coercion of the majority through a politics of non-compliance, silence, and spiritual solitude.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Works
  3. Philosophical Themes
    1. Virtue Theory
    2. Code of Resistance
    3. Metaphysical Dualism
    4. Epistemology and Certitude
  4. Interpretation and Relevance
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Biography

Born on November 28, 1624 Angélique Arnauld d’Andilly belonged to a noblesse de robe family prominent at the French court.  Her father Robert Arnauld d’Andilly was the superintendent of the estate of the Duc d’Orléans, the brother of Louis XIII; her mother Catherine Le Fèvre de la Broderie Arnauld d’Andilly was the daughter of an ambassador.  The family was closely tied to the Parisian convent of Port-Royal and the Jansenist movement with which the convent was allied.  Angélique’s aunts Angélique Arnauld and Agnès Arnauld served as Port-Royal’s abbesses during the convent’s reform in the early seventeenth century; her uncle Antoine Arnauld emerged as Jansenism’s leading philosopher and theologian; her uncle Henri Arnauld, bishop of Angers, become one of the movement’s leading defenders in the episcopate.  Four other aunts and her widowed grandmother became nuns at Port-Royal; four of her sisters would follow.  Her father, one brother, and three cousins would join the solitaires, a community of priests and laymen devoted to meditation and scholarship on the grounds of Port-Royal.  Her father would distinguish himself by his translations of Latin Christian classics; her cousin Louis-Isaac Le Maître de Sacy would become France’s leading biblical exegete and translator.  From infancy, Angélique Arnauld d’Andilly imbibed the convent’s radical Augustinian philosophy and her family’s taste for patristic literature.

Angélique Arnauld d’Andilly entered the convent school of Port-Royal in 1630.  She quickly established herself as an outstanding scholar, renowned for her fluency in Greek and Latin.  Madame de Sévigné praised her as a precocious genius; although hostile to Port-Royal, the Jesuit literary critic Réné Rapin praised her grasp of the works and thought of Saint Augustine.  Now known as Soeur Angélique de Saint-Jean, she pronounced her vows as a nun of Port-Royal in 1644.  Authorities confided a series of key convent positions to her: headmistress of the convent school, novice mistress, subprioress.  In the 1650s as the dispute over Jansenism intensified, the nun commissioned a series of memoirs by and on the nuns central to the convent’s reform.  Apologetic works to prove the convent’s orthodoxy, the memoirs would survive as key literary documents attesting to the personalities and theories of Port-Royal.  Although respected for her intellectual and managerial skill, Mère Angélique de Saint-Jean did not impress all by her emotional temperament.  Even her uncle Antoine Arnauld and her aunt Mère Angélique Arnauld rebuked their niece for what they perceived as an intellectual vanity that often presented itself as icy imperiousness.

When the quarrel over Jansenism turned into “the crisis of the signature,” Mère Angélique de Saint-Jean quickly imposed herself as the head of the most intransigent group of nuns at Port-Royal.  In 1661 Louis XIV had declared that all priests, religious, and teacher must sign a formulary that assented to the Vatican’s condemnation of five theological errors allegedly contained in Cornelius Jansen’s work Augustinus.  Using the droit/fait distinction, Antoine Arnauld had argued that Jansenists could sign the formulary inasmuch as it touched on matters of droit (matters of faith and morals, in this case five theological propositions condemned by the church as heretical) but that they could not assent on matters of fait (empirical fact, in this case the church’s judgment that Jansen himself had defended the heretical propositions).  In June 1661 Soeur Angélique de Saint-Jean reluctantly signed the formulary but, against her uncle’s advice, added a postscript that indicated the strictly reserved nature of her assent.  When the Vatican annulled the reserved signatures and demanded new signatures without any postscript, Soeur Angélique de Saint-Jean cleverly added a new preface to the formulary which explained the conditional nature of the assent of the nuns.  In face of the nuns’ recalcitrance, authorities took stronger measures against the convent.  In 1664 Soeur Angelique was exiled to the convent of the Anonciades, where she lived under virtual house arrest.  In 1665 the nun was regrouped with the other nonsigneuse nuns at Port-Royal.  Deprived of the sacraments and placed under armed guard, the nuns still managed to maintain surreptitious contact with their external allies through the strategies of Soeur Angélique de Saint-Jean.  Throughout the period of persecution, the nun bitterly criticized moderates, such as Madame de Sablé, who sought to negotiate a compromise between the Jansenists and their opponents, as well as the minority of nuns who had signed the formularly without reservation.  Only with reluctance did she accept the “Peace of the Church” (1669-79), which lifted the sanctions from Port-Royal in return for minor concessions in a modified formularly.

Elected abbess in 1678, Mère Angélique de Saint-Jean delivered an extensive cycle of abbatial conferences at Port-Royal.  The conferences were largely commentaries on Scripture, the Rule of Saint Benedict, and the Constitutions of Port-Royal.  Her extensive correspondence, often promoting the works and theories of Saint Augustine to her spiritual directees, and writings of questions dealing with persecution received a large circulation among laity allied with Port-Royal.  In 1679, the persecution of Port-Royal abruptly recommenced.  Archbishop François Harlay de Champvallon ordered the closure of the convent’s school and novitiate; without the ability to accept younger members, the convent was doomed to a slow death.  The convent’s chaplain and confessors were expelled.  Although the nuns were free to pursue their cloistered activities, the newly imposed clerics clearly attempted to convince the nuns to renounce their alleged Jansenist heresies.

During the rest of her abbacy, Mère Angélique de Saint-Jean protested the injustice of this new persecution through letters addressed to bishops, courtiers, aristocrats, and ambassadors.  Her correspondence with the pope and the king shows her characteristic boldness.  Her appeal to Pope Innocent XI is a thinly veiled attack on the Jesuits: “If Your Holiness could finally be informed about all we have suffered, brought about only by the jealousy and malice of certain people against some very learned and very pious theologians, some of whom have participated in the governance of this convent, I am sure that the narrative of these sufferings, which has few parallels in recent centuries, would soften the heart of Your Holiness [L; letter of May 29, 1679 to Pope Innocent XI].”  Her protest to Louis XIV is a rebuke of the refusal of the throne to explain on what grounds this new persecution is justified: “Sire, it is the gravest sorrow of those who have such sentiments [of loyalty toward you] to perceive that you see us as something evil, but we have no way to leave this very painful state of affairs since we are not permitted to know what has placed us in this situation and what still keeps us here [L; letter of February 6, 1680 to King Louis XIV].”  Despite her protests, the sanctions against Port-Royal remained in place and the aging convent became increasingly isolated.

Still in office as abbess, Mère Angélique de Saint-Jean Arnauld d’Andilly died on January 29, 1684.

2. Works

In terms of philosophical significance the most important works of Mère Angélique de Saint-Jean Arnauld d’Andilly are the commentaries produced during her abbacy (1678-84).  Discourses on the Rule of Saint Benedict gives the ancient monastic rule a radical Augustinian edge by its insistence on the absolute necessity of grace to cultivate any of the moral virtues praised by Saint Benedict.  Conferences on the Constitutions of Port-Royal emphasizes the rights of nuns to limited self-government and the right of the abbess to act as the principal spiritual director and theologian of the convent.  Reflections to Prepare the Nuns for Persecution, a commentary on Mère Agnès Arnauld’s earlier Counsels, stresses the opposition between the world and the disciple;  it limits the moral virtues and spiritual dispositions necessary to resist persecution for the sake of personal conscience.

Other opuscules develop Mère Angélique de Saint Jean’s epistemology and political philosophy.  On the Danger of Hesitation and Doubt Once We Know Our Duty analyzes the act of doubt in terms of power relationships. Never neutral, the exercise of self-doubt by a persecuted minority often serves the interests of a majority determined to vanquish the minority and coerce a change in its opinions.  Three Conferences on the Duty to Defend the Church argues that authentic religious obedience is not servility; it can express itself by staunch opposition to civil and ecclesiastical authorities when the latter endorse error or illegitimately invade the sanctuary of conscience.

The extensive correspondence of the abbess also indicates how her militant brand of Augustinianism differs from the more moderate version promoted by the clerical advisers of Port-Royal.  Her epistolary exchange with her uncle Antoine Arnauld details her opposition to compromise over the issue of the Augustinus and expresses the stark opposition between world and self which she considers the fate of concupiscent humanity.

The abbess’s best known-work, the autobiographical Report of Capitivity, details her house arrest at the Anonciade convent; it illustrates how Mère Angélique de Saint-Jean personally used the techniques of resistance to oppression she champions in her more theoretical works.  Discourses of Mère Angélique de Saint-Jean Called “Miséricordes” provides a radical Augustinian framework for the Port-Royal genre of miséricorde, a type of eulogy for deceased nuns and lay benefactors given by the abbess in chapter.  In Mère Angélique de Saint-Jean’s version, the moral virtues of the deceased are clearly the work of divine grace, not of human will; they are an earnest of the election to which God’s inscrutable sovereignty has summoned them.

3. Philosophical Themes

Militancy is the salient trait of the philosophy developed by Mère Angélique de Saint-Jean.  Drawing on the general Augustinian philosophy of Port-Royal, the abbess stresses the stark opposition to the world which should characterize such a philosophy.  Her virtue theory conceives the monastic vows as a species of martyrdom against a corrupt society.  Her dualistic metaphysics studies the drama of the human will as a war between the opposed loves of self and of God.  In her theory of knowledge, the abbess condemns the exercise of doubt as a subtle acquiescence to powerful ecclesiastical and civic authorities who seek to coerce conscience.  In analyzing possible material cooperation with the persecutors of the convent, Arnauld d’Andilly insists on resistance rather than compromise as the path of authentic virtue.

a. Virtue Theory

In Discourses on the Rule of Saint Benedict [DRSB], Mère Angélique de Saint-Jean provides a commentary on the founding rule of Benedictine monasticism.  The commentary develops a theory of virtue which indicates the radical Augustinian moral orientation of the abbess’s moral philosophy.  The traditional monastic virtues assume a distinctive Jansenist coloration in the abbess’s treatment of them.

The virtue of obedience, embodied through the monastic vow of obedience to one’s superior, acquires a new necessity because of the radically disordered nature of human reason.  In this Augustinian account of human concupiscence, fallen reason is no longer capable of self-governance.  “In the original state of creation, there was a perfect relationship between human reason and will.  At the present time, however, this is no longer the case.  Reason has become an instrument in the hands of self-will, which uses it in an improper and destructive way by arming itself with the false appearances of reason to find justice in injustice itself [DRSB, 243].”  The virtue of silence also serves to curb the passions generated by the concupiscent will.  “In maintaining silence we mortify vanity, curiosity, self-love, and all the other poisons that use the tongue to spill outside and to encourage their impetuous, disordered movements [DRSB, 267].”  Similarly, the virtue of humility, the most prized moral virtue in Benedict’s original rule, is tied by the abbess to the controversial Jansenist doctrine of the small number of the elect.  “It is quite certain that only a few will be saved, since one must be saved through humility, which consists in the love of humility and abasement [DRSB, 311].”

The lack of such self-denying moral virtues in the majority of humanity indicates the depth of the depravity of the postlapsarian will.  “There is something perverted in humanity: its will….Humanity is wounded because it turned on itself by acting through its own will [DRSB, 326].”  In its state of weakness, humanity is utterly dependent on God’s grace to heal its concupiscence and to permit it to exercise its will on behalf of the moral good.  “We need God to give us his grace and light.  Without this assistance we move away from the path of salvation rather than toward it.  We are only shadows by ourselves.  We are mistaken about any light we seem to have if it is not God himself who lights our lamps and illumines us [DRSB, 53].”  In this Augustinian perspective, all authentic moral virtue is the result of God’s grace, not of human initiative.  Alleged natural virtue is an illusion of human pride.

In a distinctive recasting of the Augustinian framework of virtue, Mère Angélique de Saint-Jean underscores the militant nature of the moral virtues inspired by grace.  The monastic virtue of humility entails martyrdom as the nun confronts a persecutory world.  “We are obliged to be in the situation of suffering martyrdom….We do not know what God will expose us to, but we do know that as Christians and as nuns we are called to follow Jesus Christ and Jesus Christ crucified, to carry our cross after him and to renounce ourselves.  This cannot be done without suffering [DRSB, 381].”  Rather than providing a sinecure from the warfare of a fallen world, the monastic virtues steel the nuns for a spiritual combat demanding the loss of one’s very self.

b. Code of Resistance

The Augustinian theory of virtue grounds Mère Angélique de Saint Jean’s ethical code of resistance, developed abundantly in Reflections to Prepare the Nuns for Persecution [RPNP].  A commentary on Mère Agnès Arnauld’s earlier Counsels on the Conduct Which the Nuns Should Maintain In the Event of a Change in the Governance of the Convent, the abbess systematically substitutes exhortations to militant resistance for her aunt’s earlier counsels of prudent moderation.

This militant conception of the moral life appears clearly in Mère Angélique de Saint-Jean’s martial transposition of the theological virtues, the source of all authentic moral virtue.  The virtue of faith is no longer the simple assent of the mind to the truths revealed by God; it is a militant witness to the truth of this revelation through long-suffering combat.  “It is faith that supports us in all our afflictions.  Only on faith can we lean for the hope of our salvation.  It obliges us to believe in the mercy of God and to have recourse to this mercy in all our difficulties [RPNP, 20].”  Interpreted from a neo-Platonic dualistic perspective, this combative faith opposes the intellectual and moral inclination of the senses.  “We are everywhere in our senses.  If we are not careful, we follow their judgment rather than that of faith….Our faith should penetrate all the veils that fall before our eyes [RPNP, 288].”  It combats the passions, which can easily induce the believer to flee her moral duties during persecution.  “Faith lifts us up and makes us the master of our passions, while love for ourselves makes us slaves of an infinite number of masters, under whose domination we lose, if we are not careful, the true freedom of the children of God [RPNP, 168].”  Echoing the fideism of Sant-Cyran, the abbess argues that faith must oppose reason itself, when this all too human reason rationalizes away the persecution that is the price of witness to the truth.  “There is still one thing essential to make our suffering perfect: to arm ourselves against the reasoning of the human mind opposed to the principles of faith, which teaches us to find glory in disdain, riches in poverty, life in death [RPNP, 160].”  In this martial recasting of the theological virtues, Mère Angélique de Saint-Jean condemns fear as the most dangerous of the passions and cowardice as the gravest of the vices.

To endure persecution by the opponents of Port-Royal, Mère Angélique de Saint-Jean constructs a code of resistance to the oppressive authorities which is more rigorous than the supple code proposed by her aunt earlier in the persecution.  Whereas Mère Agnès had argued that nuns should largely follow the directives given by superiors in a foreign convent, Mère Angélique de Saint-Jean counsels strict non-compliance.  Whereas her aunt had recommended limited communications with certain appointed confessors and lecturers, Mère Angélique de Saint-Jean insists on determined refusal.  The abbess stresses in particular the need to refuse dialogue with all the imposed authorities.  Although apparently innocent, the purpose of such dialogue is to break the convictions of the persecuted nun and coerce her into surrender.  “People who find themselves removed from all occupations can easily become too preoccupied with considering only the faults and imperfections of their past life…They permit themselves to be overwhelmed by this view of things, which beats them down into mistrust and convinces them that they do not have enough proof that God was in them to persevere in that state to which he had called them.  So they wanted to seek counsel and light elsewhere and consulted other persons instead of those persons whom God had removed in order to be replaced by God in all things [RPNP, 116].”  In the psychological warfare imposed by the enemies of Port-Royal, isolation can easily lead to a pervasive remorse, easily exploited by one’s opponents.  The natural desire to seek dialogue in such persecutory solitude must be repressed in the knowledge that such communication will only be used to shake one’s religious convictions and to destroy one’s grace-inspired willingness to bear witness to the truth in the midst of persecution.

To survive persecution and its attendant psychological solitude, Mère Angélique de Saint-Jean develops a spirituality for the oppressed.  The imposed solitude, in which the nuns are deprived of the sacraments and of the celebration of the divine office, should be received as a grace and not only as a punishment.  The isolation imposed on the protesting nuns invites them to a more immediate communion with God, no longer accessed through the mediation of sacrament, ordained priest, and communal prayer.  “We can say that God in his goodness has put us in a place where we must serve him and that he has given us many means to accomplish this which we would not have otherwise encountered.  We must believe that the heavenly fire that descended apparently to steal certain goods will only turn this assistance into something of a more spiritual nature.  This will teach us to belong to God in a more perfect manner through suffering and privation than through peace and abundance [PNRP, 222].”  In the ecclesiastical deprivations provoked by their refusal to assent to falsehoods, the nuns have discovered a communion with God that transcends the limits of sacrament and social intercourse.  The recognition of God as pure Spirit actually intensifies when the only access to God becomes the solitary prayer of the individual persecuted for the sake of justice.

c. Metaphysical Dualism

Tied to the Augustinian account of virtue is a broader Augustinian metaphysical dualism.  The struggle to embrace the good reflects a deeper struggle in humanity between the peccatory will, locked into the self’s vanity, and the redeemed will, freed toward the love of God.  This civil war within humanity reflects a fundamental polarity between the forces of light and darkness that agitate the cosmos itself.  The Conferences on the Constitutions of the Monastery of Port-Royal exhibit this pervasive metaphysical dualism, even in Mère Angélique de Saint-Jean’s commentary on the legal provisions of the convent’s constitution.

Often citing Saint Augustine’s City of God, Mère Angélique de Saint-Jean conceives human nature primarily in terms of the orientation of its will.  The moral agent turns either toward the self in sin or toward God in authentic love.  “We must always arrive at the principle of Saint Augustine: love has built two cities; we are necessarily citizens of one or the other.  The love of God right up to the contempt of ourselves constitutes the City of God and the kingdom of Jesus Christ.  The love of ourselves right up to the contempt of God builds Babylon, which is the kingdom of the demon [CCPR, I: 321].”  In Mère Angélique’s dualistic universe, there is no middle ground between the virtuous and the vicious, the divine and the demonic.  The central volitional act of love turns either toward the creature or toward the Creator in an itinerary of damnation or salvation.

Only grace can free the concupiscent human will from its downward inclination.  Jesus Christ is not only the unsurpassable model of moral righteousness; he is the cause of this righteousness in the will of the disciple through the redemption wrought by the cross.  “Jesus Christ is not only our model; in order to become a source of grace for us, he annihilated himself.  As Saint Paul says, he shed his own blood to purify us from our dead works [CCPR, I: 384].”  It is the cross that frees the moral agent from the losing spiritual combat with vice into which the agent has been conceived.  Grace’s instauration or restoration of the virtuous life within the will and action of the disciple is as radical as grace’s resurrection of the dead.

d. Epistemology and Certitude

The ethics of resistance developed by Mère Angélique de Saint-Jean has its own epistemology.  The abbess repeatedly warns her embattled subjects that the very willingness to engage in doubt concerning one’s contested religious convictions is to prepare a moral surrender to the opponents of the truth concerning grace.  The opuscule On the Danger of Hesitation and Doubt Once We Know Our Duty [DHD] elaborates the abbess’s argument that rather than being a neutral exercise, the entertainment of doubt on one’s central theological beliefs constitutes a moral danger for the subject who engages in it.

When people are persecuted for their beliefs, the natural inclination of the persecuted is to seek the end of duress by negotiating with their opponents.  A compromise on the disputed points is seen as a supreme good, since it would promise the end of persecution.  Mère Angélique de Saint-Jean warns, however, that persecution is the normal state for the Christian.  The fact that’s one witness provokes the violent opposition of the world’s powerful normally indicates that one is on the path of truth rather than that of error.  “The servants of God know that they could never be in a stronger state of assurance than when they must suffer.  When their enemies hold them in a state of captivity, they find themselves in a greater freedom.  They are in less danger than when they are in the greatest of dangers [DHD, 290].”  Rather than encouraging doubt and debilitating self-scrutiny, the taste of persecution should assure the persecuted that their witness, in this case their testimony on behalf of the sovereignty of divine grace, defends a truth which a vain self-sufficient world desires to crush.  The fact of persecution should strengthen rather than weaken the certitude with which the persecuted hold their well-considered beliefs.

Another problem with the exercise of doubt is the network of power in which all acts of doubt and certitude are embedded.  Any dialogue between the Port-Royal Jansenists and their opponents is based on inequality.  The wealth and juridical/military power available to the persecuting members of state and church far outweigh the meager resources of the persecuted nuns.  Furthermore, the political concerns of the opponents of the nuns will dominate a dialogue in which the nuns’ concerns for the faith will be marginalized.  “These types [of negotiations] only open the door to purely human types of reasoning and all too carnal thoughts.  In these negotiations they claim to be willing to examine everything.  In such a case, one would have to be willing to disarm faith itself…We often speak without thinking through our greatest enemies, the senses, which borrow from reason what they need to plead their cause and often clothe themselves with the most beautiful verbal appearances [DHD, 291].”  To engage in doubt in such a rigged dialogue is not to enter into a mutual pursuit of the truth.  It is to surrender to those who will dominate the discussions through their superior power, eloquence, and emotional appeals to the interest of the persecuted in survival and freedom.  The most powerful and seductive arguments, not the most truthful, will determine the course and outcome of the proposed dialogue.  Moreover, the hypothetical willingness to abandon carefully developed convictions regarding grace and salvation borders on the gravely sinful. Fidelity to truth must trump the instinct for personal or corporate survival.  “Our faith is worth more than a convent and our conscience should be preferred to a building that in God’s sight would only be our tomb if we ever clung to it by defiling our conscience [DHD, 294].”

4. Interpretation and Relevance

Beginning with the eighteenth-century editions of her work, Mère Angélique de Saint-Jean has fascinated her commentators by her combative personality and by the high-profile persecution she and her convent endured.  The literary critic Sainte-Beuve and the dramatist Montherlant have continued this emphasis on the personality of the militant abbess and have provided a negative portrait of a sectarian whose stubbornness plunged her community into an isolation which more diplomatic leadership might have avoided.  The problem with this emphasis on the headstrong personality of the abbess lies in its obfuscation of the philosophical and theological positions which the abbess defended in her numerous works.  Drama trumps theory.  The originality of Mère Angélique de Saint-Jean’s philosophy has also been obscured by its assimilation to the generic Augustinianism of the Jansenist movement.  Her disagreements with the Jansenist mainstream, expressed in the stormy correspondence with her uncle Antoine Arnauld, have often been ignored.

The current philosophical retrieval of Mère Angèlique de Saint-Jean has stressed the philosophy of resistance to oppression and the radical Augustinian recasting of moral virtue which the abbess develops in her writings.  Her epistemological analysis of the exercise of doubt as an expression of power imbalances between the majority and an ostracized minority constitutes one of the most contemporary traits of her philosophy of the duty to resist a peccatory and persecutory world.

5. References and Further Reading

The translations from French to English above are by the author of this article.

a. Primary Sources

  • Arnauld d’Andilly, Mère Angélique de Saint-Jean. Conférences de la Mère Angélique de Saint-Jean sur les Constitutions du monastère de Port-Royal du Saint-Sacrement, ed. Dom Charles Clémencet, 3 vols. (Utrecht: Aux dépens de la Compagnie, 1760).
    • The abbess’s commentary on the constitutions of Port-Royal stresses the rights of the nun and the abbess concerning the governance of the monastery.
  • Arnauld d’Andilly, Mère Angélique de Saint-Jean. Discours de la Révérende Mère Marie Angélique de S. Jean, Abbesse de P.R. des Champs, sur la Règle de S. Benoît (Paris: Osmont et Delespine, 1736).
    • The abbess’s commentary on the Rule of Saint Benedict has a neo-Augustinian stress on the grace essential for any practice of the Benedictine moral virtues.  The actual text of Mère Angélique de Saint-Jean’s commentary must be distinguished from Mère Angélique Arnauld’s earlier commentary on the Rule, which has been interpolated into the printed text.
  • Arnauld d’Andilly, Mère Angélique de Saint-Jean. Discours de la R. Mère Angélique de S. Jean, appellés Miséricordes, ou Recommandations, faites en chapitre, de plusieurs personnes unies à la Maison de Port-Royal des Champs (Utrecht: C. Le Fevre, 1735).
    • This collection of eulogies stresses that divine grace rather than human effort is the ultimate cause of the moral virtues apparent in the lives of righteous nuns and laity associated with Port-Royal.
  • Arnauld d’Andilly, Mère Angélique de Saint-Jean. Lettres de la Mère Angélique de Saint-Jean, ed. Rachel Gillet (P.R. Let 358-61).
    • Extant only in manuscript form at the Bibliothèque de la Société de Port-Royal in Paris, this three-volume collection of letters shows the metaphysical and ethical dualism of the abbess, especially in her letters to Antoine Arnauld.
  • Arnauld d’Andilly, Mère Angélique de Saint-Jean. Réflexions de la Mère Angélique de Saint-Jean Arnauld d’Andilly, Sur le danger qu’il y a d’hésiter et de douter, quand une fois l’on connaît son devoir, in Vies intéressantes et édifiantes des religieuses de Port-Royal et de plusieurs personnes qui y étaient attachées (Utrecht: Aux dépens de la Compagnie, 1750), I: 289-97.
    • This epistemological opuscule analyzes the exercise of doubt in terms of the power imbalance between majority and minority in times of persecution.
  • Arnauld d’Andilly, Mère Angélique de Saint-Jean. Réflexions de la R. Mère Angélique de S. Jean Arnauld, Abbesse de P.R. des Champs, Pour preparer ses soeurs à la persécution, conformément aux Avis que la R. Mère Agnès avait laissés sur cette matière aux religieuses de ce monastère (n.p.: 1737).
    • This address analyzes the virtues and dispositions necessary to resist oppression in the domain of religious conscience.
  • Arnauld d’Andilly, Mère Angélique de Saint-Jean. Relation de la capitivité, ed. Louis Cognet (Paris: Gallimard, 1954.)
    • This autobiographical narrative relates Soeur Angélique de Saint-Jean’s internment at the Anonciade convent during the crisis of the signature in 1664-65.  The work illustrates the nun’s methods of resistance to what she considered illegitimate authority.  A digital version of this work is available at Gallica: Bibliothèque numérique on the webpage of the Bibliothèque nationale de France.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Carr, Thomas M. Voix des Abbesses au grand siècle; La prédication au féminin à Port-Royal (Tübingen: Narr, 2006).
    • The monograph studies the varied literary genres and the moral pragmatism of the discourses given by Mère Angélique de Saint-Jean during her abbacy.
  • Conley, John J. Adoration and Annihilation: The Convent Philosophy of Port-Royal (Notre Dame, IN: University of Notre Dame Press: 2009): 175-236.
    • This philosophical study of the abbess stresses her Augustinian virtue theory, defense of women’s freedom, and theory and practice of resistance to oppressive authorities.
  • Grébil, Germain. “L’image de Mère Angélique de Saint-Jean au XVIIIe siècle,” Chroniques de Port-Royal 35 (1985): 110-25.
    • The article offers a Cartesian interpretation of the abbess’s treatise on the danger of doubt.
  • Montherlant, Henri de. Port-Royal (Paris: Gallimard, 1954).
    • The dramatic tragedy presents Mère Angélique de Saint-Jean as a haughty but heroic strategist of resistance.
  • Orcibal, Jean. Port-Royal entre le miracle et l’obéissance: Flavie Passart et Angélique de St.-Jean Arnauld d’Andilly (Paris: Desclée de Brouwer, 1957).
    • The monograph studies the complex theological background in the dispute between the signeuse Soeur Flavie and the nonsigneuse Soeur Angélique de Saint Jean during the crisis of the signature.
  • Sainte-Beuve, Charles-Augustin. Port-Royal, 3 vols., ed. Maxime Leroy (Paris: Gallimard, 1953-55).
    • The nineteenth-century literary critic presents a critical portrait of Mère Angélique de Saint-Jean as a willful, intolerant sectarian.
  • Sibertin-Blanc, Brigitte. “Biographie et personnalité de la séconde Angélique,” Chroniques de Port-Royal 35 (1985): 74-82.
    • This biographical sketch justifiably expresses skepticism about the abbess’s claim of ignorance concerning the philosophical and theological disputes behind the controversy over Jansen’s Augustinus.
  • Weaver, F. Ellen. “Angélique de Saint-Jean: Abbesse et ‘mythographe’ de Port-Royal,” Chroniques de Port-Royal 35 (1985): 93-108.
    • The historian of Port-Royal demonstrates the apologetic nature and ends of the numerous memoirs written and commissioned by Mère Angélique de Saint-Jean.

Author Information

John J. Conley
Loyola University
U. S. A.

Martin Buber (1878—1965)

Martin Buber was a prominent twentieth century philosopher, religious thinker, political activist and educator. Born in Austria, he spent most of his life in Germany and Israel, writing in German and Hebrew. He is best known for his 1923 book, Ich und Du (I and Thou), which distinguishes between “I-Thou” and “I-It” modes of existence. Often characterized as an existentialist philosopher, Buber rejected the label, contrasting his emphasis on the whole person and “dialogic” intersubjectivity with existentialist emphasis on “monologic” self-consciousness. In his later essays, he defines man as the being who faces an “other” and constructs a world from the dual acts of distancing and relating. His writing challenges Kant, Hegel, Marx, Kierkegaard, Nietzsche, Dilthey, Simmel and Heidegger, and he influenced Emmanuel Lévinas.

Buber was also an important cultural Zionist who promoted Jewish cultural renewal through his study of Hasidic Judaism. He recorded and translated Hasidic legends and anecdotes, translated the Bible from Hebrew into German in collaboration with Franz Rosenzweig, and wrote numerous religious and Biblical studies. He advocated a bi-national Israeli-Palestinian state and argued for the renewal of society through decentralized, communitarian socialism. The leading Jewish adult education specialist in Germany in the 1930s, he developed a philosophy of education based on addressing the whole person through education of character, and directed the creation of Jewish education centers in Germany and teacher-training centers in Israel.

Most current scholarly work on Buber is done in the areas of pedagogy, psychology and applied social ethics.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Philosophical Anthropology
    1. Introduction
    2. “I-Thou” and “I-It”
    3. Distance and Relation
    4. Confirmation and Inclusion
    5. Good and Evil
    6. Hindrances to Dialogue
  3. Religious Writings
    1. Hasidic Judaism
    2. Biblical Studies
  4. Political Philosophy
  5. Philosophy of Education
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. General
    2. Mythology
    3. Philosophical Works
    4. Political and Cultural Writing
    5. Religious Studies
    6. Secondary Sources

1. Biography

Mordecai Martin Buber was born in Vienna in February 8, 1878. When he was three, his mother deserted him, and his paternal grandparents raised him in Lemberg (now, Lviv) until the age of fourteen, after which he moved to his father’s estate in Bukovina. Buber would only see his mother once more, when he was in his early thirties. This encounter he described as a “mismeeting” that helped teach him the meaning of genuine meeting. His grandfather, Solomon, was a community leader and scholar who edited the first critical edition of the Midrashim traditional biblical commentaries. Solomon’s estate helped support Buber until it was confiscated during World War II.

Buber was educated in a multi-lingual setting and spoke German, Hebrew, Yiddish, Polish, English, French and Italian, with a reading knowledge of Spanish, Latin, Greek and Dutch. At the age of fourteen he began to be tormented with the problem of imagining and conceptualizing the infinity of time. Reading Kant’s Prolegomena to All Future Metaphysics helped relieve this anxiety. Shortly after he became taken with Nietzsche’s Thus Spoke Zarathustra, which he began to translate into Polish. However, this infatuation with Nietzsche was short lived and later in life Buber stated that Kant gave him philosophic freedom, whereas Nietzsche deprived him of it.

Buber spent his first year of university studies at Vienna. Ultimately the theatre culture of Vienna and the give-and-take of the seminar format impressed him more than any of his particular professors. The winters of 1897-98 and 1898-99 were spent at the University of Leipzig, where he took courses in philosophy and art history and participated in the psychiatric clinics of Wilhelm Wundt and Paul Flecksig (see Schmidt’s Martin Buber’s Formative Years: From German Culture to Jewish Renewal, 1897-1909 for an analysis of Buber’s life during university studies and a list of courses taken). He considered becoming a psychiatrist, but was upset at the poor treatment and conditions of the patients.

The summer of 1899 he went to the University of Zürich, where he met his wife Paula Winkler (1877-1958, pen name Georg Munk). Paula was formally converted from Catholicism to Judaism. They had two children, Rafael (1900-90) and Eva (1901-92).

From 1899-1901 Buber attended the University of Berlin, where he took several courses with Wilhelm Dilthey and Georg Simmel. He later explained that his philosophy of dialogue was a conscious reaction against their notion of inner experience (Erlebnis) (see Mendes-Flohr’s From Mysticism to Dialogue: Martin Buber’s Transformation of German Social Thought for an analysis of the influence of Dilthey and Simmel). During this time Buber gave lectures on the seventeenth century Lutheran mystic Jakob Böhme, publishing an article on him in 1901 and writing his dissertation for the University of Vienna in 1904 “On the History of the Problem of Individuation: Nicholas of Cusa and Jakob Böhme.” After this he lived in Florence from 1905-06, working on a habilitation thesis in art history that he never completed.

In 1904 Buber came across Tzevaat Ha-RIBASH (The Testament of Rabbi Israel, the Baal-Shem Tov), a collection of sayings by the founder of Hasidism. Buber began to record Yiddish Hasidic legends in German, publishing The Tales of Rabbi Nachman, on the Rabbi of Breslov, in 1906, and The Legend of the Baal-Shem in 1907. The Legend of the Baal-Shem sold very well and influenced writers Ranier Maria Rilke, Franz Kafka and Herman Hesse. Buber was a habitual re-writer and editor of all of his writings, which went through many editions even in his lifetime, and many of these legends were later rewritten and included in his later two volume Tales of the Hasidim (1947).

At the same time Buber emerged as a leader in the Zionist movement. Initially under the influence of Theodor Herzl, Buber’s Democratic Faction of the Zionist Party, but dramatically broke away from Herzl after the 1901 Fifth Zionist Congress when the organization refused to fund their cultural projects. In contrast to Herzl’s territorial Zionism, Buber’s Zionism, like that of Ahad Ha’am, was based on cultural renewal. Buber put together the first all-Jewish art exhibition in 1901, and in 1902 co-founded Jüdischer Verlag, a publishing house that produced collections of Jewish poetry and art, with poet Berthold Feiwel, graphic artist Ephraim Mosche Lilien and writer Davis Trietsche. This dedication to the arts continued through the 1910s and 20s, as Buber published essays on theatre and helped to develop both the Hellerau Experimental Theatre and the Dusseldorf Playhouse (see Biemann and Urban’s works for Buber’s notion of Jewish Renaissance and Braiterman for Buber’s relation to contemporaneous artistic movements).

Buber was the editor of the weekly Zionist paper Die Welt in 1901 and of Die Gesellschaft, a collection of forty sociopsychological monographs, from 1905-12 (On Die Gesellschaft see Mendes-Flohr’s From Mysticism to Dialogue: Martin Buber’s Transformation of German Social Thought). His influence as a Jewish leader grew with a series of lectures given between 1909-19 in Prague for the Zionist student group Bar Kochba, later published as “Speeches on Judaism,” and was established by his editorship of the influential monthly journal Der Jude from 1916-24. He also founded, and from 1926-29 co-edited, Die Kreatur with theologian Joseph Wittig and physician Viktor von Weizsäcker. Always active in constructing dialogue across borders, this was the first high level periodical to be co-edited by members of the Jewish, Protestant and Catholic faiths. Buber continued inter-religious dialogue throughout his life, corresponding for instance with Protestant theologians Paul Tillich and Reinhold Niebuhr.

Despite his prolific publishing endeavors, Buber struggled to complete I and Thou. First drafted in 1916 and then revised in 1919, it was not until he went through a self-styled three-year spiritual ascesis in which he only read Hasidic material and Descartes’ Discourse on Method that he was able to finally publish this groundbreaking work in 1923. After I and Thou, Buber is best known for his translation of the Hebrew Bible into German. This monumental work began in 1925 in collaboration with Franz Rosenzweig, but was not completed until 1961, more than 30 years after Rosenzweig’s death.

In 1923 Buber was appointed the first lecturer in “Jewish Religious Philosophy and Ethics” at the University of Frankfurt. He resigned after Hitler came into power in 1933 and was banned from teaching until 1935, but continued to conduct Jewish-Christian dialogues and organize Jewish education until he left for British Palestine in 1938. Initially Buber had planned to teach half a year in Palestine at Hebrew University, an institution he had helped to conceive and found, and half a year in Germany. But Kristallnacht, the devastation of his library in Heppenheim and charges of Reichsfluchtsteuer (Tax on Flight from the Reich), because he had not obtained a legal emigration permit, forced his relocation.

Buber engaged in “spiritual resistance” against Nazism through communal education, seeking to give a positive basis for Jewish identity by organizing the teaching of Hebrew, the Bible and the Talmud. He reopened an influential and prestigious Frankfurt center for Jewish studies, Freies jüdisches Lehrhaus (Free Jewish House of Learning) in 1933 and directed it until his emigration. In 1934 he created and directed the “Central Office for Jewish Adult Educationfor the Reichsvertretung der deutschen Juden (National Representation of German Jews).

After giving well-attended talks in Berlin at the Berlin College of Jewish Education and the Berlin Philharmonie, Buber, who as one of the leading Jewish public figures in Germany became known as the “arch-Jew” by the Nazis, was banned from speaking in public or at closed sessions of Jewish organizations. Despite extreme political pressure, he continued to give lectures and published several essays, including “The Question to the Single One” in 1936, which uses an analysis of Kierkegaard to attack the foundations of totalitarianism (see Between Man and Man).

After his emigration Buber became Chair of the Department of Sociology of Hebrew University, which he held until his retirement in 1951. Continuing the educational work he had begun in Germany, Buber established Beth Midrash l’Morei Am (School for the Education of Teachers of the People) in 1949 and directed it until 1953. This prepared teachers to live and work in the hostels and settlements of the newly arriving emigrants. Education was based on the notion of dialogue, with small classes, mutual questioning and answering, and psychological help for those coming from detention camps.

From the beginning of his Zionist activities Buber advocated Jewish-Arab unity in ending British rule of Palestine and a binational state. In 1925 he helped found Brit Shalom (Covenant of Peace) and in 1939 helped form the League for Jewish-Arab Rapprochement and Cooperation, which consolidated all of the bi-national groups. In 1942, the League created a political platform that was used as the basis for the political party the Ichud (or Ihud, that is, Union). For his work for Jewish-Arab parity Dag Hammarskjöld (then Secretary-General of the United Nations) nominated him for the Nobel Peace Prize in 1959.

In addition to his educational and political activities, the 1940s and 50s saw an outburst of more than a dozen books on philosophy, politics and religion, and numerous public talks throughout America and Europe. Buber received many awards, including the Goethe Prize of the University of Hamburg (1951), the Peace Prize of the German Book Trade (1953), the first Israeli honorary member of the American Academy of Arts and Sciences (1961), and the Erasmus Prize (1963). However, Buber’s most cherished honor was an informal student celebration of his 85th birthday, in which some 400 students from Hebrew University rallied outside his house and made him an honorary member of their student union.

On June 13, 1965 Martin Buber died. The leading Jewish political figures of the time attended his funeral. Classes were cancelled and hundreds of students lined up to say goodbye as Buber was buried in the Har-Hamenuchot cemetery in Jerusalem.

2. Philosophical Anthropology

a. Introduction

Martin Buber’s major philosophic works in English are the widely read I and Thou (1923), a collection of essays from the 1920s and 30s published as Between Man and Man, a collection of essays from the 1950s published as The Knowledge of Man: Selected Essays and Good and Evil: Two Interpretations (1952). For many thinkers Buber is the philosopher of I and Thou and he himself often suggested one begin with that text. However, his later essays articulate a complex and worthy philosophical anthropology.

Buber called himself a “philosophical anthropologist” in his 1938 inaugural lectures as Professor of Social Philosophy at the Hebrew University of Jerusalem, entitled “What is Man?” (in Between Man and Man). He states that he is explicitly responding to Kant’s question “What is man?” and acknowledges in his biographic writings that he has never fully shaken off Kant’s influence. But while Buber finds certain similarities between his thought and Kant’s, particularly in ethics, he explains in “Elements of the Interhuman” (in The Knowledge of Man, 1957) that their origin and goal differ. The origin for Buber is always lived experience, which means something personal, affective, corporeal and unique, and embedded in a world, in history and in sociality. The goal is to study the wholeness of man, especially that which has been overlooked or remains hidden. As an anthropologist he wants to observe and investigate human life and experience as it is lived, beginning with one’s own particular experience; as a philosophic anthropologist he wants to make these particular experiences that elude the universality of language understood. Any comprehensive overview of Buber’s philosophy is hampered by his disdain for systemization. Buber stated that ideologization was the worst thing that could happen to his philosophy and never argued for the objectivity of his concepts. Knowing only the reality of his own experience, he appealed to others who had analogous experiences.

Buber begins these lectures by asserting that man only becomes a problem to himself and asks “What is man?” in periods of social and cosmic homelessness. Targeting Kant and Hegel, he argues that while this questioning begins in solitude, in order for man to find who he is, he must overcome solitude and the whole way of conceiving of knowledge and reality that is based on solitude. Buber accuses Hegel of denigrating the concrete human person and community in favor of universal reason and argues that man will never be at home or overcome his solitude in the universe that Hegel postulates. With its emphasis on history, Hegel locates perfection in time rather than in space. This type of future-oriented perfection, Buber argues, can be thought, but it cannot be imagined, felt or lived. Our relationship to this type of perfection can only rest on faith in a guarantor for the future.

Instead, Buber locates realization in relations between creatures. Overcoming our solitude, which tends to oscillate between conceiving of the self as absorbed in the all (collectivism) and the all as absorbed into the self (solipsistic mysticism), we realize that we always exist in the presence of other selves, and that the self is a part of reality only insofar as it is relational. In contrast to the traditional philosophic answers to “What is man?” that fixate on reason, self-consciousness or free will, Buber argues that man is the being who faces an “other”, and a human home is built from relations of mutual confirmation. 

b. “I-Thou” and “I-It”

Martin Buber’s most influential philosophic work, I and Thou (1923), is based on a distinction between two word-pairs that designate two basic modes of existence: I-Thou” (Ich-Du) and “I-It” (Ich-Es). The “I-Thou” relation is the pure encounter of one whole unique entity with another in such a way that the other is known without being subsumed under a universal. Not yet subject to  classification or limitation, the “Thou” is not reducible to spatial or temporal characteristics. In contrast to this the “I-It” relation is driven by categories of “same” and “different” and focuses on universal definition. An “I-It” relation experiences a detached thing, fixed in space and time, while an “I-Thou” relation participates in the dynamic, living process of an “other”.

Buber characterizes “I-Thou” relations as “dialogical” and “I-It” relations as “monological.” In his 1929 essay “Dialogue,” Buber explains that monologue is not just a turning away from the other but also a turning back on oneself (Rückbiegung). To perceive the other as an It is to take them as a classified and hence predictable and manipulable object that exists only as a part of one’s own experiences. In contrast, in an “I-Thou” relation both participants exist as polarities of relation, whose center lies in the between (Zwischen).

The “I” of man differs in both modes of existence. The “I” may be taken as the sum of its inherent attributes and acts, or it may be taken as a unitary, whole, irreducible being. The “I” of the “I-It” relation is a self-enclosed, solitary individual (der Einzige) that takes itself as the subject of experience. The “I” of the “I-Thou” relation is a whole, focused, single person (der Einzelne) that knows itself as subject. In later writings Buber clarified that inner life is not exhausted by these two modes of being. However, when man presents himself to the world he takes up one of them.

While each of us is born an individual, Buber draws on the Aristotelian notion of entelechy, or innate self-realization, to argue that the development of this individuality, or sheer difference, into a whole personality, or fulfilled difference, is an ongoing achievement that must be constantly maintained. In I and Thou, Buber explains that the self becomes either more fragmentary or more unified through its relationships to others. This emphasis on intersubjectivity is the main difference between I and Thou and Buber’s earlier Daniel: Dialogues on Realization (1913). Like I and Thou, Daniel distinguishes between two modes of existence: orienting (Rientierung), which is a scientific grasp of the world that links experiences, and realization (Verwirklichung), which is immersion in experience that leads to a state of wholeness. While these foreshadow the “I-It” and “I-Thou” modes, neither expresses a relationship to a real “other”. In I and Thou man becomes whole not in relation to himself but only through a relation to another self. The formation of the “I” of the “I-Thou” relation takes place in a dialogical relationship in which each partner is both active and passive and each is affirmed as a whole being. Only in this relationship is the other truly an “other”, and only in this encounter can the “I” develop as a whole being.

Buber identifies three spheres of dialogue, or “I Thou” relations, which correspond to three types of otherness. We exchange in language, broadly conceived, with man, transmit below language with nature, and receive above language with spirit. Socrates is offered as the paradigmatic figure of dialogue with man, Goethe, of dialogue with nature, and Jesus, of dialogue with spirit. That we enter into dialogue with man is easily seen; that we also enter into dialogue with nature and spirit is less obvious and the most controversial and misunderstood aspect of I and Thou. However, if we focus on the “I-Thou” relationship as a meeting of singularities, we can see that if we truly enter into relation with a tree or cat, for instance, we apprehend it not as a thing with certain attributes, presenting itself as a concept to be dissected, but as a singular being, one whole confronting another.

Dialogue with spirit is the most difficult to explicate because Buber uses several different images for it. At times he describes dialogue with spirit as dialogue with the “eternal Thou,” which he sometimes calls God, which  is eternally “other”. Because of this, I and Thou was widely embraced by Protestant theologians, who also held the notion that no intermediary was necessary for religious knowledge. Buber also argues that the precondition for a dialogic community is that each member be in a perpetual relation to a common center, or “eternal Thou”. Here the “eternal Thou” represents the presence of relationality as an eternal value. At other times, Buber describes dialogue with spirit as the encounter with form that occurs in moments of artistic inspiration or the encounter with personality that occurs in intensive engagement with another thinker’s works. Spiritual address is that which calls us to transcend our present state of being through creative action. The eternal form can either be an image of the self one feels called to become or some object or deed that one feels called to bring into the world.

Besides worries over Buber’s description of man’s dialogue with nature and spirit, three other main complaints have been raised against I and Thou. The first, mentioned by Walter Kaufmann in the introduction to his translation of I and Thou, is that the language is overly obscure and romantic, so that there is a risk that the reader will be aesthetically swept along into thinking the text is more profound than it actually is. Buber acknowledges that the text was written in a state of inspiration. For this reason it is especially important to also read his later essays, which are more clearly written and rigorously argued. E. la B. Cherbonnier notes in “Interrogation of Martin Buber” that every objective criticism of Buber’s philosophy would belong, by definition, to the realm of “I-It”. Given the incommensurability of the two modes, this means no objective criticism of the “I-Thou” mode is possible. In his response Buber explains that he is concerned to avoid internal contradiction and welcomes criticism. However, he acknowledges that his intention was not to create an objective philosophic system but to communicate an experience.

Finally, I and Thou is often criticized for denigrating philosophic and scientific knowledge by elevating “I-Thou” encounters above “I-It” encounters. It is important to note that Buber by no means renounces the usefulness and necessity of “I-It” modes. His point is rather to investigate what it is to be a person and what modes of activity further the development of the person. Though one is only truly human to the extent one is capable of “I-Thou” relationships, the “It” world allows us to classify, function and navigate. It gives us all scientific knowledge and is indispensable for life. There is a graduated structure of “I-It” relations as they approximate an “I-Thou” relationship, but the “I-Thou” remains contrasted to even the highest stage of an “I-It” relation, which still contains some objectification. However, each “Thou” must sometimes turn into an “It”, for in responding to an “other” we bind it to representation. Even the “eternal Thou” is turned into an It for us when religion, ethics and art become fixed and mechanical. However, an “I-It” relation can be constituted in such a way as to leave open the possibility of further “I-Thou” encounters, or so as to close off that possibility.

c. Distance and Relation

In I and Thou Martin Buber discusses the a priori basis of the relation, presenting the “I-Thou” encounter as the more primordial one, both in the life of humans, as when an infant reaches for its mother, and in the life of a culture, as seen in relationships in primitive cultures. However, in the 1951 essay “Distance and Relation,” written in the midst of the Palestinian conflicts, he explains that while this may be true from an anthropological perspective, from an ontological one it must be said that distance (Urdistanz) is the precondition for the emergence of relation (Beziehung), whether “I-Thou” or “I-It”. Primal distance sets up the possibility of these two basic word pairs, and the between (Zwischen) emerges out of them. Humans find themselves primally distanced and differentiated; it is our choice to then thin or thicken the distance by entering into an “I-Thou” relation with an “other” or withdrawing into an “I-It” mode of existence.

Only man truly distances, Buber argues, and hence only man has a “world.” Man is the being through whose existence what “is” becomes recognized for itself. Animals respond to the other only as embedded within their own experience, but even when faced with an enemy, man is capable of seeing his enemy as a being with similar emotions and motivations. Even if these are unknown , we are able to recognize that these unknown qualities of the other are “real” while our fantasies about the other are not. Setting at a distance is hence not the consequence of a reflective, “It” attitude, but the precondition for all human encounters with the world, including reflection.

Buber argues that every stage of the spirit, however primal, wishes to form and express itself. Form assumes communication with an interlocutor who will recognize and share in the form one has made. Distance and relation mutually correspond because in order for the world to be grasped as a whole by a person, it must be distanced and independent from him and yet also include him, and his attitude, perception, and relation to it. Consequently, one cannot truly have a world unless one receives confirmation of one’s own substantial and independent identity in one’s relations with others.

Relation presupposes distance, but distance can occur without genuine relation. Buber explains that distance is the universal situation of our existence; relation is personal becoming in the situation. Relation presupposes a genuine other and only man sees the other as other. This other withstands and confirms the self and hence meets our primal instinct for relation. Just as we have the instinct to name, differentiate, and make independent a lasting and substantial world, we also have the instinct to relate to what we have made independent. Only man truly relates, and when we move away from relation we give up our specifically human status.

d. Confirmation and Inclusion

Confirmation is a central theme of Martin Buber’s philosophic texts as well as his articles on education and politics. Buber argues that, while animals sometimes turn to humans in a declaring or announcing mode, they do not need to be told that they are what they are and do not see whom they address as an existence independent of their own experience. But because man experiences himself as indeterminate, his actualization of one possibility over another needs confirmation. In confirmation one meets, chooses and recognizes the other as a subject with the capacity to actualize one’s own potential. In order for confirmation to be complete one must know that he is being made present to the other.

As becomes clear in his articles on education, confirmation is not the same as acceptance or unconditional affirmation of everything the other says or does. Since we are not born completely focused and differentiated and must struggle to achieve a unified personality, sometimes we have to help an “other” to actualize themselves against their own immediate inclination. In these cases confirmation denotes a grasp of the latent unity of the other and confirmation of what the other can become. Nor does confirmation imply that a dialogic or “I-Thou” relation must always be fully mutual. Helping relations, such as educating or healing, are necessarily asymmetrical.

In the course of his writing Buber uses various terms, such as “embrace” or “inclusion” (Umfassung), “imagining the real” (Realphantasie), and in reference to Kant, “synthesizing apperception,” to describe the grasp of the other that is necessary for confirmation and that occurs in an “I-Thou” relation. “Imagining the real” is a capacity; “making present” is an event, the highest expression of this capacity in a genuine meeting of two persons. This form of knowledge is not the subsumption of the particularity of the other under a universal category. When one embraces the pain of another, this is not a sense of what pain is in general, but knowledge of this specific pain of this specific person. Nor is this identification with them, since the pain always remains their own specific pain. Buber differentiates inclusion from empathy. In empathy one’s own concrete personality and situation is lost in aesthetic absorption in the other. In contrast, through inclusion, one person lives through a common event from the standpoint of another person, without giving up their own point of view.

e. Good and Evil

Martin Buber’s 1952 Good and Evil: Two Interpretations answers the question “What is man?” in a slightly different way than the essays in Between Man and Man and The Knowledge of Man. Rather than focusing on relation, Good and Evil: Two Interpretations emphasizes man’s experience of possibility and struggle to become actualized. Framing his discussion around an analysis of psalms and Zoroastrian and Biblical myths, Buber interprets the language of sin, judgment and atonement in purely existential terms that are influenced by Hasidic Judaism, Kant’s analysis of caprice (Willkür) and focused will (Wille), and Kierkegaard’s discussion of anxiety. Buber argues that good and evil are not two poles of the same continuum, but rather direction (Richtung) and absence of direction, or vortex (Wirbel). Evil is a formless, chaotic swirling of potentiality; in the life of man it is experienced as endless possibility pulling in all directions. Good is that which forms and determines this possibility, limiting it into a  particular direction. We manifest the good to the extent we become a singular being with a singular direction.

Buber explains that imagination is the source of both good and evil. The “evil urge” in the imagination generates endless possibilities. This is fundamental and necessary, and only becomes “evil” when it is completely separated from direction. Man’s task is not to eradicate the evil urge, but to reunite it with the good, and become a whole being. The first stage of evil is “sin,” occasional directionlessness. Endless possibility can be overwhelming, leading man to grasp at anything, distracting and busying himself, in order to not have to make a real, committed choice. The second stage of evil is “wickedness,” when caprice is embraced as a deformed substitute for genuine will and becomes characteristic. If occasional caprice is sin, and embraced caprice is wickedness, creative power in conjunction with will is wholeness. The “good urge” in the imagination limits possibility by saying no to manifold possibility and directing passion in order to decisively realize potentiality. In so doing it redeems evil by transforming it from anxious possibility into creativity. Because of the temptation of possibility, one is not whole or good once and for all. Rather, this is an achievement that must be constantly accomplished.

Buber interprets the claim that in the end the good are rewarded and the bad punished as the experience the bad have of their own fragmentation, insubstantiality and “non-existence.” Arguing that evil can never be done with the whole being, but only out of inner contradiction, Buber states that the lie or divided spirit is the specific evil that man has introduced into nature. Here “lie” denotes a self that evades itself, as manifested not just in a gap between will and action, but more fundamentally, between will and will. Similarly, “truth” is not possessed but is rather lived in the person who affirms his or her particular self by choosing direction. This process, Buber argues, is guided by the presentiment implanted in each of us of who we are meant to become.

f. Hindrances to Dialogue

Along with the evasion of responsibility and refusal to direct one’s possibilities described in Good and Evil: Two Interpretations (1952), Buber argues in “Elements of the Interhuman” (1957, in The Knowledge of Man) that the main obstacle to dialogue is the duality of “being” (Sein) and “seeming” (Schein). Seeming is the essential cowardice of man, the lying that frequently occurs in self-presentation when one seeks to communicate an image and make a certain impression. The fullest manifestation of this is found in the propagandist, who tries to impose his own reality upon others. Corresponding to this is the rise of “existential mistrust” described in Buber’s 1952 address at Carnegie Hall, “Hope for this Hour” (in Pointing the Way). Mistrust takes it for granted that the other dissembles, so that rather than genuine meeting, conversation becomes a game of unmasking and uncovering unconscious motives. Buber criticizes Marx, Nietzsche and Freud for meeting the other with suspicion and perceiving the truth of the other as mere ideology. Similarly, in his acceptance speech for the 1953 Peace Prize of the German Book Trade, “Genuine Dialogue and the Possibilities of Peace” (in Pointing the Way), Buber argues the precondition for peace is dialogue, which in turn rests on trust. In mistrust one presupposes that the other is likewise filled with mistrust, leading to a dangerous reserve and lack of candor.

As it is a key component of his philosophic anthropology that one becomes a unified self through relations with others, Buber was also quite critical of psychiatrist Carl Jung and the philosophers of existence. He argued that subsuming reality under psychological categories cuts man off from relations and does not treat the whole person, and especially objected to Jung’s reduction of psychic phenomenon to categories of the private unconscious. Despite his criticisms of Freud and Jung, Buber was intensely interested in psychiatry and gave a series of lectures at the Washington School of Psychiatry at the request of Leslie H. Farber (1957, in The Knowledge of Man) and engaged in a public dialogue with Carl Rogers at the University of Michigan (see Anderson and Cissna’s The Martin Buber-Carl Rogers Dialogue: A New Transcript With Commentary). In these lectures, as well as his 1951 introduction to Hans Trüb’s Heilung aus der Begegnung (in English as “Healing Through Meeting” in Pointing the Way), Buber criticizes the tendency of psychology to “resolve” guilt without addressing the damaged relations at the root of the feeling. In addition to Farber, Rogers and Trüb, Buber’s dialogical approach to healing influenced a number of psychologists and psychoanalysts, including Viktor von Weizsäcker, Ludwig Binswanger and Arie Sborowitz.

Often labeled an existentialist, Buber rejected the association. He asserted that while his philosophy of dialogue presupposes existence, he knew of no philosophy of existence that truly overcomes solitude and lets in otherness far enough. Sartre in particular makes self-consciousness his starting point. But in an “I-Thou” relation one does not have a split self, a moment of both experience and self-reflection. Indeed, self-consciousness is one of the main barriers to spontaneous meeting. Buber explains the inability to grasp otherness as perceptual inadequacy that is fostered as a defensive mechanism in an attempt to not be held responsible to what is addressing one. Only when the other is accorded reality are we held accountable to him; only when we accord ourselves a genuine existence are we held accountable to ourselves. Both are necessary for dialogue, and both require courageous confirmation of oneself and the other.

In Buber's examples of non-dialogue, the twin modes of distance and relation lose balance and connectivity, and one pole overshadows the other, collapsing the distinction between them. For example, mysticism (absorption in the all) turns into narcissism (a retreat into myself), and collectivism (absorption in the crowd) turns into lack of engagement with individuals (a retreat into individualism). Buber identifies this same error in Emmanuel Lévinas’ philosophy. While Lévinas acknowledged Buber as one of his main influences, the two had a series of exchanges, documented in Levinas & Buber: Dialogue and Difference, in which Buber argued that Lévinas had misunderstood and misapplied his philosophy. In Buber’s notion of subject formation, the self is always related to and responding to an “other”. But when Lévinas embraces otherness, he renders the other transcendent, so that the self always struggles to reach out to and adequately respond to an infinite other. This throws the self back into the attitude of solitude that Buber sought to escape.

3. Religious Writings

a. Hasidic Judaism

In his 1952 book Eclipse of God, Martin Buber explains that philosophy usually begins with a wrong set of premises: that an isolated, inquiring mind experiences a separate, exterior world, and that the absolute is found in universals. He prefers the religious, which in contrast, is founded on relation, and means the covenant of the absolute with the particular. Religion addresses whole being, while philosophy, like science, fragments being. This emphasis on relation, particularity and wholeness is found even in Buber’s earliest writings, such as his 1904 dissertation on the panentheistic German mystics Nicholas of Cusa and Jakob Böhme, “On the History of the Problem of Individuation: Nicholas of Cusa and Jakob Böhme.” Nicholas of Cusa postulates that God is a “coincidence of opposites” and that He “contracts” himself into each creature, so that each creature best approximates God by actualizing its own unique identity. Böhme similarly presents God as both transcendent and immanent, and elaborates that perfection of individuality is developed through mutual interaction.

The same elements that attracted Buber to Nicholas of Cusa and Böhme he found fulfilled in Hasidism, producing collections of Hasidic legends and anecdotes (Tales of Rabbi Nachman, The Legend of the Baal-Shem and Tales of the Hasidim) as well as several commentaries (including On Judaism, The Origin and Meaning of Hasidism and The Way of Man: According to the Teaching of Hasidism). The Hebrew tsimtsum expresses God’s “contraction” into the manifold world so that relation can emerge. In distinction from the one, unlimited source, this manifold is limited, but has the choice and responsibility to effect the unification (yihud) of creation. The restoration of unity is described as “the freeing of the sparks,” understood as the freeing of the divine element from difference through the hallowing of the everyday.

In addition to defining Hasidism by its quest for unity, Buber contrasts the Hasidic insistence on the ongoing redemption of the world with the Christian belief that redemption has already occurred through Jesus Christ. Each is charged with the task to redeem their self and the section of creation  they occupy. Redemption takes place in the relation between man and creator, and is neither solely dependent on God’s grace nor on man’s will. No original sin can prohibit man from being able to turn to God. However, Buber is not an unqualified voluntarist. As in his political essays, he describes himself as a realistic meliorist. One cannot simply will redemption. Rather, each person’s will does what it can with the particular concrete situation that faces it.

The Hebrew notions of kavana, or concentrated inner intention, and teshuva, or (re)turning to God with one’s whole being, express the conviction that no person or action is so sinful that it cannot be made holy and dedicated to God. Man hallows creation by being himself and working in his own sphere. There is no need to be other, or to reach beyond the human. Rather, one’s ordinary life activities are to be done in such a way that they are sanctified and lead to the unification of the self and creation. The legends and anecdotes of the historic zaddikim (Hasidic spiritual and community leaders) that Buber recorded depict persons who exemplify the hallowing of the everyday through the dedication of the whole person.

If hallowing is successful, the everyday is the religious, and there is no split between the political, social or religious spheres. Consequently Buber rejects the notion that God is to be found through mystical ecstasy in which one loses one’s sense of self and is lifted out of everyday experience. Some commentators, such as Paul Mendes-Flohr and Maurice Friedman, view this as a turn away from his earlier preoccupation with mysticism in texts such as Ecstatic Confessions (1909) and Daniel: Dialogues on Realization (1913). In later writings, such as “The Question to the Single One” (1936, in Between Man and Man) and “What is Common to All” (1958, in The Knowledge of Man), Buber argues that special states of unity are experiences of self-unity, not identification with God, and that many forms of mysticism express a flight from the task of dealing with the realities of a concrete situation and working with others to build a common world into a private sphere of illusion. Buber is especially critical of Kierkegaard’s assertion that the religious transcends the ethical. Drawing on Hasidic thought, he argues that creation is not an obstacle on the way to God, but the way itself.

Buber did not strictly follow Judaism’s religious laws. Worried that an “internal slavery” to religious law stunts spiritual growth, he did not believe that revelation could ever be law-giving in itself, but that revelation becomes legislation through the self-contradiction of man. Principles require acting in a prescribed way, but the uniqueness of each situation and encounter requires each to be approached anew. He could not blindly accept laws but felt compelled to ask continually if a particular law was addressing him in his particular situation. While rejecting the universality of particular laws, this expresses a meta-principle of dialogical readiness.

Buber’s interpretation of Hasidism is not without its critics. Gershom Scholem in particular accused Buber of selecting elements of Hasidism to confirm his “existentialist” philosophy. Scholem argued that the emphasis on particulars and the concrete that Buber so admired does not exist in Hasidism and that Buber’s erroneous impressions derive from his attention to oral material and personalities at the expense of theoretical texts. In general Buber had little historical or scholarly interest in Hasidism. He took Hasidism to be less a historical movement than a paradigmatic mode of communal renewal and was engaged by the dynamic meaning of the anecdotes and the actions they pointed to. In a 1943 conversation with Scholem, Buber stated that if Scholem’s interpretation of Hassidism was accurate, then he would have labored for forty years over Hasidic sources in vain, for they would no longer interest him.

b. Biblical Studies

In addition to his work with Hasidism, Martin Buber also translated the Bible from Hebrew into German with Franz Rosenzweig, and produced several religious analyses, including Kingship of God, Moses: The Revelation and the Covenant, On the Bible: Eighteen Studies, The Prophetic Faith and Two Types of Faith. Counter to religious thinkers such as Karl Barth and Emmanuel Lévinas, Buber argues that God is not simply a wholly transcendent other, but also wholly same, closer to each person than his or her own self. However, God can be known only in his relation to man, not apart from it. Buber interprets religious texts, and the Bible in particular, as the history of God’s relation to man from the perspective of man. Thus, it is not accurate to say that God changes throughout the texts, but that the theophany, the human experience of God, changes. Consequently, Buber characterizes his approach as tradition criticism, which emphasizes experiential truth and uncovers historical themes, in contrast to source criticism, which seeks to verify the accuracy of texts.

When translating the Bible, Buber’s goal was to make the German version as close to the original oral Hebrew as possible. Rather than smoothing over difficult or unclear passages, he preferred to leave them rough. One important method was to identify keywords (Leitworte) and study the linguistic relationship between the parts of the text, uncovering the repetition of word stems and same or similar sounding words. Buber also tried to ward against Platonizing tendencies by shifting from static and impersonal terms to active and personal terms. For instance, whereas kodesh had previously been translated “holy,” he used the term “hallowing” to emphasize activity. Similarly, God is not the “Being” but the “Existing,” and what had been rendered “Lord” became “I,” “Thou” and “He.”

Buber made two important distinctions between forms of faith in his religious studies. In the 1954 essay “Prophecy, Apocalyptic, and the Historical Hour” (in Pointing the Way), he distinguishes between “apocalyptic” approaches, which dualistically separate God from world, and regard evil as unredeemable, and “prophetic” stances, which preserve the unity of God with the world and promise the fulfillment of creation, allowing evil to find direction and serve the good. In the prophetic attitude one draws oneself together so that one can contribute to history, but in the apocalyptic attitude one fatalistically resigns oneself. The tension between these two tendencies is illustrated in his 1943 historical novel Gog and Magog: A Novel (also published as For the Sake of Heaven: A Hasidic Chronicle-Novel).

In Two Types of Faith (1951), Buber distinguishes between the messianism of Jesus and the messianism of Paul and John. While he had great respect for Jesus as a man, Buber did not believe that Jesus took himself to be divine. Jesus’ form of faith corresponds to emunah, faith in God’s continual presence in the life of each person. In contrast, the faith of Paul and John, which Buber labels pistis, is that God exists in Jesus. They have a dualistic notion of faith and action, and exemplify the apocalyptic belief in irredeemable original sin and the impossibility of fulfilling God’s law. Buber accuses Paul and John of transforming myth, which is historically and biographically situated, into gnosis, and replacing faith as trust and openness to encounter with faith in an image.

4. Political Philosophy

Martin Buber’s cultural Zionism, with its early emphasis on aesthetic development, was inextricably linked to his form of socialism. Buber argues that it is an ever-present human need to feel at home in the world while experiencing confirmation of one’s functional autonomy from others. The development of culture and aesthetic capacities is not an end in itself but the precondition for a fully actualized community, or “Zionism of realization” (Verwirklichungszionismus). The primary goal of history is genuine community, which is characterized by an inner disposition toward a life in common. This refutes the common misconception that an “I-Thou” relation is an exclusive affective relation that cannot work within a communal setting. Buber critiques collectivization for creating groups by atomizing individuals and cutting them off from one another. Genuine community, in contrast, is a group bound by common experiences with the disposition and persistent readiness to enter into relation with any other member, each of whom is confirmed as a differentiated being. He argues that this is best achieved in village communes such as the Israeli kibbutzim.

In his 1947 study of utopian socialism, Paths in Utopia, and 1951 essay “Society and the State” (in Pointing the Way), Buber distinguished between the social and political principles. The political principle, exemplified in the socialism of Marx and Lenin, tends towards centralization of power, sacrificing society for the government in the service of an abstract, universal utopianism. In contrast, influenced by his close friend, anarchist Gustav Landauer, Buber postulates a social principle in which the government serves to promote community. Genuine change, he insists, does not occur in a top-down fashion, but only from a renewal of man’s relations. Rather than ever-increasing centralization, he argues in favor of federalism and the maximum decentralization compatible with given social conditions, which would be an ever-shifting demarcation line of freedom.

Seeking to retrieve a positive notion of utopianism, Buber characterizes genuine utopian socialism as the ongoing realization of the latent potential for community in a concrete place. Rather than seeking to impose an abstract ideal, he argues that genuine community grows organically out of the topical and temporal needs of a given situation and people. Rejecting economic determinism for voluntarism, he insists that socialism is possible to the extent that people will a revitalization of communal life. Similarly, his Zionism is not based on the notion of a final state of redemption but an immediately attainable goal to be worked for. This shifts the notion of utopian socialism from idealization to actualization and equality.

Despite his support of the communal life of the kibbutzim, Buber decried European methods of colonization and argued that the kibbutzim would only be genuine communities if they were not closed off from the world. Unlike nationalism, which sees the nation as an end in itself, he hoped Israel would be more than a nation and would usher in a new mode of being. The settlers must learn to live with Arabs in a vital peace, not merely next to them in a pseudo-peace that he feared was just a prelude to war. As time went on, Buber became increasingly critical of Israel, stating that he feared a victory for the Jews over the Arabs would mean a defeat for Zionism.

Buber’s criticism of Israeli policies led to many public debates with its political leaders, in particular David Ben-Gurion, Israel’s first Prime Minister. In a relatively early essay, “The Task” (1922), Buber argued that the politicization of all life was the greatest evil facing man. Politics inserts itself into every aspect of life, breeding mistrust. This conviction strengthened over time, and in his 1946 essay “A Tragic Conflict” (in A Land of Two Peoples) he described the notion of a politicized “surplus” conflict. When everything becomes politicized, imagined conflict disguises itself as real, tragic conflict. Buber viewed Ben-Gurion as representative of this politicizing tendency. Nevertheless, Buber remained optimistic, believing that the greater the crisis the greater the possibility for an elemental reversal and rebirth of the individual and society.

Buber’s relationship to violence was complicated. He argued that violence does not lead to freedom or rebirth but only renewed decline, and deplored revolutions whose means were not in alignment with their end. Afraid that capital punishment would only create martyrs and stymie dialogue, he protested the sentencing of both Jewish and Arab militants and called the execution of Nazi Adolf Eichmann a grave mistake. However, he insisted that he was not a pacifist and that, sometimes, just wars must be fought. This was most clearly articulated in his 1938 exchange of letters with Gandhi, who compared Nazi Germany to the plight of Indians in South Africa and suggested that the Jews use satyagraha, or non-violent “truth-force.” Buber was quite upset at the comparison of the two situations and replied that satyagraha depends upon testimony. In the face of total loss of rights, mass murder and forced oblivion, no such testimony was possible and satyagraha was ineffective (see Pointing the Way and The Letters of Martin Buber: A Life of Dialogue).

5. Philosophy of Education

In addition to his work as an educator, Martin Buber also delivered and published several essays on philosophy of education, including “Education,” given in 1925 in Heidelberg (in Between Man and Man). Against the progressive tone of the conference, Buber argued that the opposite of compulsion and discipline is communion, not freedom. The student is neither entirely active, so that the educator can merely free his or her creative powers, nor is the student purely passive, so that the educator merely pours in content. Rather, in their encounter, the educative forces of the instructor meet the released instinct of the student. The possibility for such communion rests on mutual trust.

The student trusts in the educator, while the educator trusts that the student will take the opportunity to fully develop herself. As the teacher awakens and confirms the student’s ability to develop and communicate herself, the teacher learns to better encounter the particular and unique in each student. In contrast to the propagandist, the true educator influences but does not interfere. This is not a desire to change the other, but rather to let what is right take seed and grow in an appropriate form. Hence they have a dialogical relationship, but not one of equal reciprocity. If the instructor is to do the job it cannot be a relationship between equals.

Buber explains that one cannot prepare students for every situation, but one can guide them to a general understanding of their position and then prepare them to confront every situation with courage and maturity. This is character or whole person education. One educates for courage by nourishing trust through the trustworthiness of the educator. Hence the presence and character of the educator is more important than the content of what is actually taught. The ideal educator is genuine to his or her core, and responds with his or her “Thou”, instilling trust and enabling students to respond with their “Thou”. Buber acknowledges that teachers face a tension between acting spontaneously and acting with intention. They cannot plan for dialogue or trust, but they can strive to leave themselves open for them.

In “Education and World-View” (1935, in Pointing the Way), Buber further elaborates that in order to prepare for a life in common, teachers must educate in such a way that both individuation and community are advanced. This entails setting groups with different world-views before each other and educating, not for tolerance, but for solidarity. An education of solidarity means learning to live from the point of view of the other without giving up one’s own view. Buber argues that how one believes is more important than what one believes. Teachers must develop their students to ask themselves on what their world-view stands, and what they are doing with it.

6. References and Further Reading

a. General

  • “Interrogation of Martin Buber.” Conducted by M.S. Friedman. Philosophic Interrogations. Ed. S. and B. Rome. New York: Holt, Rinehart and Winston, 1964.
    • Questions by more than 50 major thinkers and Buber's responses.
  • Martin Buber Werkausgabe. Ed. Paul Mendes-Flohr and Peter Schäffer. Gütersloh: Gütersloher Verlagshaus, 2001.

    • A critical 21-volume compilation of the complete writings of Buber in German, designed to replace Buber’s self-edited Werke.
  • The Letters of Martin Buber: A Life of Dialogue. Ed. Nahum N. Glatzer and Paul Mendes-Flohr. Trans. Richard and Clara Winston and Harry Zohn. Syracuse, N.Y.: Syracuse University Press, 1996.
    • Includes letters to his wife and family as well as many notable thinkers, including Gandhi, Walter Benjamin, Albert Einstein, Herman Hesse, Franz Kafka, Albert Camus, Gustav Landauer and Dag Hammarskjöld.
  • The Martin Buber Reader. Ed. Asher Biemann. New York: Macmillan, 2002.
  • The Philosophy of Martin Buber: The Library of Living Philosophers, 12. Ed. Paul A. Schilpp and Maurice Friedman. La Salle, I.L.: Open Court, 1967.
    • Large collection of essays by Gabriel Marcel, Charles Hartshorne, Emmanuel Lévinas, Hugo Bergman, Jean Wahl, Ernst Simon, Walter Kaufmann and many others, with Buber’s replies and autobiographical statements.
  • Werke. 3 vols. Vol I: Schriften zur Philosophie. Vol 2: Schriften zur Bible. Vol. 3: Schriften zur Chassidismus. Munich and Heidelberg: Kösel Verlag and Lambert Schneider, 1962-63.
    • Comprehensive collection (more than four thousand pages long), edited by Buber. Lacks some very early and very late essays, which may be found in the Martin Buber Archives of the Jewish National and University Library at the Hebrew University of Jerusalem.

b. Mythology

  • Tales of Rabbi Nachman. Trans. Maurice Friedman. Amherst, N.Y.: Humanity Books, 1988.
  • The Legend of the Baal-Shem. Trans. Maurice Friedman. London: Routledge, 2002.
  • Tales of the Hasidim (The Early Masters and The Later Masters). New York: Schocken Books, 1991.
  • Gog and Magog: A Novel. Trans. Ludwig Lewisohn. Syracuse, N.Y.: Syracuse University Press, 1999.
  • Previously published as For the Sake of Heaven: A Hasidic Chronicle-Novel.

c. Philosophical Works

  • Between Man and Man. Trans. Ronald Gregor-Smith. New York: Routledge, 2002.
    • Good introduction to Buber’s thought that includes “Dialogue,” “What is Man?” “The Question to the Single One” (on Kierkegaard), and lectures on education.
  • Daniel: Dialogues on Realization. Trans. Maurice S. Friedman. New York: McGraw-Hill, 1965.
    • Early work, important for understanding the development to I and Thou.
  • Eclipse of God: Studies in the Relation Between Religion and Philosophy. Trans. Maurice Friedman. Atlantic Highlands, N.J.: International Humanities Press, 1988.
    • Includes critiques of Heidegger, Sartre and Jung.
  • Good and Evil: Two Interpretations. Pt. 1: Right and Wrong, trans. R.G. Smith. Pt. 2: Images of Good and Evil, trans. M. Bullock. Upper Saddle River, N.J.: Prentice Hall, 1997.
    • Very helpful to an understanding of Buber’s moral philosophy and relation to existentialism.
  • I and Thou. Trans. Ronald Gregor-Smith. New York: Scribner, 1984.
  • I and Thou. Trans. Walter Kaufmann. New York: Simon and Schuster, 1996.
  • The Knowledge of Man: Selected Essays. Trans. Maurice Friedman and Ronald Gregor-Smith. Amherst, N.Y.: Prometheus Books, 1998.
    • Mature and technical, with the important “Distance and Relation” and lectures given for the Washington School of Psychiatry.

d. Political and Cultural Writing

  • A Land of Two Peoples: Martin Buber on Jews and Arabs. Ed. Paul R. Mendes-Flohr. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 2005.
  • Israel and the World: Essays in a Time of Crisis. New York: Schocken Books, 1963.
  • On Zion: The History of an Idea. Trans. Stanley Godman. New York: Schocken Books, 1986.
  • Paths in Utopia. Trans. R. F. Hull. New York: Syracuse University Press, 1996.
    • History and defense of utopian socialism, including analyses of Marx, Lenin, Landauer and kibbutzim.
  • Pointing the Way: Collected Essays. Ed. and trans. Maurice Friedman. Atlantic Highlands, N.J.: Humanities Press, 1988.
    • Mix of early and late essays, including essays on theatre, Bergson and Gandhi, and “Education and World-View,” “Society and the State,” “Hope for the Hour” and “Genuine Dialogue and the Possibilities of Peace.”
  • The First Buber: Youthful Zionist Writings of Martin Buber. Trans. Gilya G. Schmidt. Syracuse, N.Y.: Syracuse University Press: 1999.

e. Religious Studies

  • Ecstatic Confessions: The Heart of Mysticism. Ed. Paul R. Mendes-Flohr. San Francisco: Harper & Row, 1985.
  • Hasidism and Modern Man. Ed. and trans. Maurice S. Friedman. New York: Harper Torchbooks, 1958.
  • Kingship of God. Trans. Richard W. Scheimann. New York: Harper, 1973.
  • Moses: The Revelation and the Covenant. Amherst, N.Y.: Humanity Books, 1998.
  • On Judaism. Ed. Nahum Glatzer. New York: Schocken Books, 1967.
  • On the Bible: Eighteen Studies. Ed. Nahum Glatzer. New York: Schocken Books, 1968.
  • The Origin and Meaning of Hasidism. Ed. and trans. Maurice Friedman. New York: Horizon Press, 1960.
  • The Prophetic Faith. New York: Collier Books, 1985.
  • The Way of Man: According to the Teaching of Hasidism. London: Routledge, 2002.
    • Best short introduction to Buber’s interpretation of Hasidism.
  • Two Types of Faith. Trans. Norman P. Goldhawk. Syracuse, N.Y.: Syracuse University Press, 2003.

f. Secondary Sources

  • Anderson, Rob and Kenneth N. Cissna. The Martin Buber-Carl Rogers Dialogue: A New Transcript With Commentary. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1997.
  • Atterton, Peter, Mathew Calarco, and Maurice Friedman, eds. Lévinas & Buber: Dialogue and Difference. Pittsburg: Duquesne University Press, 2004.
    • Mix of primary sources, commentaries and argumentative essays.
  • Biemann, Asher D. Inventing New Beginnings: On the Idea of Renaissance in Modern Judaism. Stanford, C.A.: Stanford University Press, 2009.
    • Details Buber’s notions of Jewish Renaissance and aesthetic education.
  • Braiterman, Zachary. The Shape of Revelation: Aesthetics and Modern Jewish Thought. Stanford, C.A.: Stanford University Press, 2007.
    • Studies the relation between the philosophy of Buber and Rosenzweig and the aesthetics of early German modernism, especially the transition from Jugendstil to Expressionism.
  • Friedman, Maurice S. Encounter on the Narrow Ridge: A Life of Martin Buber. New York: Paragon House, 1991.
    • Biography largely condensed from Martin Buber's Life and Work.
  • Friedman, Maurice S. Martin Buber's Life and Work. 3 vols. Vol 1: The Early Years, 1878-1923. Vol. 2: The Middle Years, 1923-1945. Vol 3: The Later Years, 1945-1965. Detroit: Wayne State University Press, 1988.
  • Mendes-Flohr, Paul. From Mysticism to Dialogue: Martin Buber’s Transformation of German Social Thought. Detroit: Wayne State University Press, 1989.
    • Explores the influence of Landauer, Dilthey and Simmel, and Buber’s work as the editor of Die Gesellschaft.
  • Schmidt, Gilya G. Martin Buber’s Formative Years: From German Culture to Jewish Renewal, 1897-1909. Tuscaloosa: University of Alabama Press, 1995.
    • Buber’s early intellectual influences, life during university studies and turn to Zionism.
  • Scholem, Gershom. “Martin Buber’s Conception of Judaism,” in On Jews and Judaism in Crisis: Selected Essays. Ed. Werner Dannhauser. New York: Schocken, 1937.
  • Shapira, Avraham. Hope for Our Time: Key Trends in the Thought of Martin Buber. Trans. Jeffrey M. Green. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1999.
    • Systematic presentation of Buber’s main philosophic concepts.
  • Theunissen, Michael. The Other: Studies in the Social Ontology of Husserl, Heidegger, Sartre, and Buber. Cambridge, M.A.: MIT Press, 1984.
  • Urban, Martina. Aesthetics of Renewal: Martin Buber’s Early Representation of Hasidism as Kulturkritik. Chicago: The University of Chicago Press, 2008.
    • Discusses Buber’s hermeneutics, notions of anthology and Jewish renewal, and phenomenological presentation of Hasidism.

Author Information

Sarah Scott
The New School for Social Research
U. S. A.

Anne Le Fèvre Dacier (1647—1720)

A distinguished classicist during the reign of the French king Louis XIV, Madame Dacier achieved renown for her translation of Greek and Latin texts into French.  Her translation of Homer’s Iliad (1699) and Odyssey (1708) remains a monument of neoclassical French prose.  In defending Homer during a new chapter of the literary quarrel between the ancients and the moderns, Dacier developed her own philosophical aesthetics.  She insists on the centrality of taste as an indicator of the level of civilization, both moral and artistic, within a particular culture.  Exalting ancient Athens, she defends a primitivist philosophy of history, in which modern society represents an artistic and ethical decline from its Hebrew and Hellenic ancestors.  A proponent of Aristotle, Dacier defends the Aristotelian theory that art imitates nature, but she adds a new emphasis on the social character of the nature that art allegedly imitates.  In her philosophy of language, she explores the nature and value of metaphor in evoking spiritual truths; she also condemns the rationalist critique of language which dismisses the fictional or the analogous as a species of obscurantism.  The Bible’s robust use of metaphor has established a literary as well as a spiritual norm for Christian civilization.  Against modern censors of classical literature on the grounds of obscenity, Dacier defends the pedagogical value of the classics, especially the epics of Homer, in forming the moral character and even the piety of those who avidly study them.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Works
  3. Philosophical Aesthetics
    1. Theory of Taste
    2. Mimesis and Nature
    3. Theory of Language
    4. Moral Pedagogy of Literature
  4. Reception and Interpretation
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Biography

Born in Preuilly-sur-Claise on August 5, 1647, Anne Le Fèvre was raised in the city of Saumur in the Loire region of central France.  Her father, Tanneguy Le Fèvre, was a professor of classical languages at a local academy.  Under her father’s tutelage, Anne Le Fèvre quickly learned Latin and Greek and demonstrated a precocious skill for the translation of the classics into French.  Her adolescent marriage in 1664 to the publisher of her father’s works, Jean Lesnier, rapidly deteriorated; the embittered spouses agreed to a permanent separation.

After the death of her father in 1674, Madame Le Fèvre Lesnier enjoyed the patronage of Pierre-Daniel Huet, a royal tutor to the French dauphin and the future bishop of Avranches.  A member of the Académie française, the scholarly cleric introduced her to the controversies surrounding Descartes in contemporary French philosophy.  Originally a supporter of Cartesianism, Huet would turn decisively against it in his Critique of Cartesian Philosophy (1689).  Huet encouraged Le Fèvre Lesnier’s move to Paris and commitment to a scholarly life devoted to the translation of the classics.

Published in 1674, her first translation, an edition of Callimachus, received the acclaim of fellow classicists.  The Duke of Montausier, the overseer of the dauphin’s education, then invited Le Fèvre Lesnier to contribute translations to the series ad usum Delphini (“for the use of the dauphin”) which he had initiated.  Her editions of Publius Annius Florus (1674), Sextus Aurelius Victor (1681), Eutropius (1683), and Dictys of Crete (1684) spread the fame of the series far beyond the court circles for which it had been originally designed.  Le Fèvre Lesnier also published independent translations of Anacreon (1681), Sappho (1681), Terence (1683), Plautus (1683), and Aristophanes (1684). The emergence of a provincial woman as France’s preeminent classicist made Madame Le Fèvre Lesnier a celebrity in the literary salons of Paris.  Padua’s Academy of Ricovrati elected her to membership in 1679.

Shortly after the death of her separated husband, Anne Le Fèvre Lesnier married fellow classicist André Dacier, a former student of her father, in 1683.  A year later, the couple retired to Castres in order to devote themselves to theological study.  Originally Protestants, both Monsieur and Madame Dacier decided to embrace Catholicism.  When they formally entered the Catholic Church in 1685, Louis XIV granted the couple a royal pension in recognition of their conversion.

In the following years, Madame Dacier published new translations of Plautus, Aristophanes, and Terence and collaborated with her husband on several translations, notably new French versions of Plutarch and Marcus Aurelius.  These translations of ancient Stoic authors reflected Madame Dacier’s sympathy for neo-Stoicism and her opposition to neo-Epicureanism in the philosophical debates of the period.  The literary skill and classical erudition of Madame Dacier earned her the praise of France’s most influential literary critic, Nicolas Boileau.

In 1699, Madame Dacier published her major work, a French translation of Homer’s Iliad.  Her version of Homer’s Odyssey followed in 1708. Widely acclaimed as both faithful translations and graceful examples of French prose, the books re-ignited the long-simmering querelle des anciens et des modernes.  Siding with the “ancients,” Dacier defended the superiority of classical literature, notably the epics of Homer, over the literary products of modern France.  Supporting the “moderns,” Antoine Houdar de la Motte published his own version of Homer in 1714, in which he radically altered the text to suit modern sensibilities and in which he criticized the stylistic and moral flaws of Homer compared with the poetry of modern France.  In the same year, Madame Dacier published her major treatise on the question: Of the Causes of the Corruption of Taste.  The work lambasted La Motte’s translation of Homer and provided a point-by-point refutation of his critique of antiquity.  The lengthy treatise also permitted Dacier to declare her philosophical allegiance to Aristotle on artistic questions and to present her own philosophy of art and language.

Even the clergy divided in this new chapter of the querelle.  Supporting La Motte, Abbé Terrasson claimed that with its superior knowledge of the world, due to the philosophy of Descartes and technological progress, modern French culture had produced a superior literature. Defending Dacier, Bishop Fénelon argued that classical literature remained superior to the uneven literary achievements of modern France.

When the Jesuit Jean Hardouin proposed a new system for interpreting Homer, Madame Dacier refuted it in her second major theoretical work: Homer Defended against the Apology of Father Hardouin, or the Sequel to the Causes of the Corruption of Taste (1716).  This treatise reconfirmed her commitment to a neo-Aristotelian theory of art and literary exegesis.  It also expanded the grounds for defending the moral and artistic superiority of ancient civilization.

Madame Dacier died at the Louvre on August 17, 1720.

2. Works

The works of Madame Dacier divide into two categories: translations from classical languages and polemical treatises.

The major translations cover the genres of history, drama, lyrical poetry, and epic.  The histories include translations of the history of Rome by Publius Annius Florus (70-140); the history of Rome by Sextus Aurelius Victor (320-390); the history of Rome by Etropius (the fourth century historian of Julian the Apostate); and the chronicle of the Trojan wars by Dictys of Crete (author of a highly fictionalized alleged eyewitness account of the war, known through a fourth-century Latin translation by Q. Septimius).  This emphasis on military and political history reflects the type of education deemed appropriate for France’s dauphin.

The dramas include translations of the comedies of Aristophanes (446-386 B.C.E.), Plautus (254-184 B.C.E.), and Terence (195-159 B.C.E.).  The lyrical poetry includes the epigrams of the Alexandrian poet Callimachus (310-240 B.C.E.), the verse of Anacreon (570-488 B.C.E.), and the love poems of Sappho (620-570 B.C.E.).  The alleged licentiousness of many of these authors appealed to the more libertine salons and sharpened the controversy over the appropriateness of a woman engaged in publication.

It was in the genre of the epic that Madame Dacier achieved her greatest fame.  Her translation of the Iliad in 1699 established her as a master of neoclassical French style as well as confirming her reputation as a preeminent classicist.  Her preface to the Iliad, staunchly defending Homer and Hellenistic civilization, helped re-launch the querelle des anciens and des modernes.  Her translation of the Odyssey in 1708 achieved similar acclaim from scholars and the general public.  Both works underwent numerous re-editions and were frequently used in Francophone secondary schools for courses in literature.

Madame Dacier wrote her two polemical treatises toward the end of her life.  On the surface, Of the Causes of the Corruption of Taste (1714) and Homer Defended against the Apology of Father Hardouin, or Sequel to the Causes of the Corruption of Taste (1716) are both occasional works.  Both books, however, transcend the immediate disputes of the quarrel over Homer; they permit Dacier to present a neo-Aristotelian theory of art, language, mimesis, and moral education.

3. Philosophical Aesthetics

The philosophical aesthetics developed by Madame Dacier appears primarily in her treatise Of the Causes of the Corruption of Taste [CCT].  Like other eighteenth-century philosophers, Dacier places the question of taste at the center of aesthetic investigation.  She considers a society’s degree of artistic taste to be linked to its degree of moral probity and political order.  In her normative judgments, Dacier praises the achievement of ancient Greece and judges modern France as decadent in comparison.  Declaring herself a partisan of Aristotle, Dacier defends the mimetic thesis that art imitates nature, but she redefines “nature” to include the psychology of the characters depicted and the predominant traits of the society mirrored in art.  Her philosophy of language defends the value of metaphorical speech against the rationalist charge of opacity.  For Dacier, classical literature possesses ethical as well as formal value inasmuch as it can encourage the formation of moral and even religious virtues in the character of the modern Christian reader.

a. Theory of Taste

For Dacier, taste is a central symptom of the general moral and political quality of society.  The capacity of a particular culture to produce and appreciate sublime works of art, especially literary works, indicates the culture’s degree of moral and civic maturity.  The decline of literary taste presages a decline in virtue among the youth who are exposed to mediocre art.  “If we tolerate false [artistic] principles spoiling the mind and judgment [of young people], there are no more resources left for them.  Bad taste and ignorance will finish off this work of leveling.  As a result, literature will be entirely lost.  And it is literature which is the source of good taste, of politeness, and of all good government” [CCT].  Dacier invokes Plato’s authority in defense of her thesis that civic virtue and vice is tied to the quality of the art and literature habitually diffused among the members of the polis.  “This is why Socrates wanted his fellow citizens to commit themselves entirely to the youth and to take great care to prepare and form good subjects for the republic” [CCT].  Through a process of empathetic imitation by its audience, great art, as exemplified by Homer’s epics, encourages the ascent of the moral, social, and political virtues central to civilization.

Fragile and fleeting, artistic taste can easily decline.  Dacier designates three principal causes of the corruption of taste: poor education; ignorance of teachers; the laziness and negligence of the pupils themselves.  Likeswise, when a society abandons the humanist ideal of an educated public who reads and cherishes the classics in the original languages, the civic virtues nurtured by exposure to the classics will inevitably fade.

Dacier identifies two particular causes of the decline of literature and morality in contemporary France.  The first is the omnipresence of licentious literature.  “One factor contributing to the corruption of taste consists of these licentious shows which directly attack religion and morals.  Their soft and effeminate poetry and music communicates all of their poison to the soul and disables all the nerves of the mind” [CCT].  Not without irony, the translator of Plautus and Aristophanes condemns licentious theater for its weakening of intellectual and moral clarity among its habitual spectators.

The second cause, the vogue of sentimental novels, operates a similar destruction of heroic virtue in its poorly constructed tales of romantic love.  “The other cause consists of these frivolous and sentimental works…these false epic poems, these absurd novels produced by ignorance and love.  They transform the greatest heroes of antiquity into bourgeois damsels.  They so accustom young people to these false characters that they can only tolerate true heroes when they resemble these bizarre and extravagant personages” [CCT].  A public sated with sentimental tales of seduction will have little capacity to understand, let alone practice, the heroic civic virtues represented by the characters of Homeric or Virgilian epic.

Dacier’s analysis of the decline of taste and the related decline of civic culture is inscribed in  her primitivist philosophy of history.  The most perfect examples of literary style lie in the inspired books of the Bible.  “When I read the books of Moses and other sacred authors who lived before the time of Homer, I am not astonished by the great taste which reigns in their writings, since they had the true God as their teacher.  One senses that no human production could possibly reach the divine character of these writings” [CCT].

Although pagan, ancient Egyptian culture receives a similar panegyric.  “I see that geometry, architecture, painting, sculpture, astronomy, and divination flourished among the Egyptians only a few centuries after the great flood.  I see a people convinced of the immortality of the soul and of the necessity of a religion, a people who had a very mysterious and enigmatic theology and who built temples and who gave to Greece her very cult and gods.  When I see the ancient monuments which remain from this people, I cannot doubt that good taste must have also reigned in their writings, although this baffles me and I do not know where all of this could have come from” [CCT].

The culture of ancient Greece, in particular the epics of Homer, also miraculously resisted the tendency of civilization to decline artistically and morally since biblical times.  “I see in Greece all at once a coup of genius.  I see a poet who, two hundred years after the Trojan War and against the degradation imprinted by nature into all the productions of the human mind, combines the glory of invention with that of perfection.  He gives us a sort of poem without any previous model, which he had imitated from no one, and which no one has been able to imitate since then.  This poem’s story, union and composition of its parts, harmony and nobility of diction, artful combination of truth and falsehood, magnificence of ideas, and sublimity of views has always made it considered as the most perfect work issuing from a human hand” [CCT].

The current disdain for Homer and other classical authors reflects the literary-cultural decadence affecting contemporary France.  The loss of the Renaissance humanist’s veneration of the classics indicates a moral and political, as well as artistic, decline for French society.  “Everywhere today there reigns a certain spirit [disdainful of the classics] more than capable of damaging literature and poetry.  This fact has already caused foreigners to reproach us that we are degenerating away from that good taste we had happily developed in the previous century” [CCT].  For Dacier, the only solution to this cultural decline is the neoclassical one: a renewed study of classical languages and literature, with a new literary effort to imitate classical authors in vernacular works and concomitantly an effort to renew political society through the imitation of the civic virtues exalted by Homer and similar Greco-Roman authors.

b. Mimesis and Nature

Throughout her polemical writings, Madame Dacier cites Aristotle’s Poetics as her primary authority for her thesis that art constitutes the imitation of nature.  An oft-cited secondary source for this mimetic theory is Horace’s Art of Poetry.  Against rationalists such as La Motte, Dacier insists that great art’s imitation of nature does not consist in the reproduction of what literally exists in the external physical world; rather, it mirrors the acts of the hidden soul and rightly incorporates mythology, hyperbole, and idealization into its portrait of the moral universe.

In imitating nature, literature must focus on what is true.  Even in writing fiction, the writer must so manipulate the characters and action that they acquire the qualities of verisimilitude.  “I am convinced that a writer writes the true more effectively than he or she does the false.  The mind struck by a real object feels it much more forcefully than if it were struck by an object it only creates by itself or that it does not believe to exist” [CCT].  Like all other artists, the poet must draw his or her truth from nature, even if the usual domain of the poet is the spiritual nature of the human soul in conflict rather than the physical landscape.

The poet’s imitation of nature is never the literal reproduction of preexistent physical or moral nature.  Embellishment of nature is often obligatory if the poet is to place into proper relief the character of his or her personages.  “The exceptional brilliance which the poet [Homer] has given to the valor of this hero [Achilles] has confused them [the critics of Homer].  They didn’t see that this exaggerated valor is there to bring out the nature of his character and not to hide his faults. Poets are like painters. They must make their hero more beautiful, as long as they always conserve the resemblance to the hero and they only add what is compatible with the basic character with which they have clothed their hero” [CCT].  In fashioning the hero who dominates the epic and tragic drama, the author inevitably eliminates and exaggerates certain details of human moral action in order to create a striking moral ideal.

To understand the legitimate freedom of the artist in the imitation of nature, it is crucial to grasp the distinction between history and poetry.  Whereas the historian depicts what actually happens, the poet can present the probable or the possible.  Whereas the historian focuses on the unique fact, the poet dwells on general human truths.  “History writes about only what has happened; poetry writes about what might have or must have happened, either necessarily or probably.  History reports on particular things, poetry on general things.  That is why poetry has greater moral value than does history.  General things interest all human beings while particular things are related only to one human being” [CCT].  In this neo-Aristotelian concept of poetic truth, the freedom of the artist is not unlimited.  Poetic license to embellish character or plot cannot trespass the limits of the probable.

The legitimate freedom of the poet can also be grasped by contrasting poetry with politics and other practical arts.  The truth expressed in the imaginative world of poetry differs from the truth sought in political judgment.  “Aristotle was right to say that ‘that one must not judge the excellence of poetry as one judges the excellence of politics, nor even the excellence of all the other arts.’  Politics and all the other arts seek the true or the possible.  Poetry seeks the astonishing and the marvelous as long as it does not clearly shock the sense of what is probable” [CCT].

Even the other fine arts do not enjoy the freedom proper to the poet in his or her evocation of nature inasmuch as they focus their imitation of nature on specific, external objects.  “In fact, all the other imitations, those of painting, sculpture, architecture, and all the other arts, aim at the imitation of only one thing” [CCT].  Literature alone imitates the universe of the human moral agent; the legitimate license of the poet flows from the challenge of this elusive, spiritual object of mimesis.

In her refutation of La Motte and other critics of Homer, Dacier defends Homer’s use of mythology and other fictional devices in his presentation of the character of Achilles.  In particular, she defends the episode of Achilles with the Phoenix, which La Motte had dismissed as a literary absurdity.  Dacier contends that the dialogue with the Phoenix helped to enhance the moral character of the flawed hero.  “No one is more convinced than I am that everything which exists in nature is not good to be depicted just because it exists.  But I believe that what the Phoenix says [in this passage disputed by La Motte] is not in the nature of the things one should not depict.  In all times and in all nations…images depend on customs and on ways of thinking.  What Homer is doing here…is still quite natural and quite appropriate to show Achilles’s tenderness.  This flows quite logically from the tenderness which the Phoenix just showed him.  It even serves to heighten the grandeur of Achilles.  What kind of child could this be who would have his tears washed away by someone like the Phoenix, son of a king?” [CCT]  The imitation of nature depends on psychological and social context.  The depiction of a mythological character like the Phoenix helps to reveal the positive moral traits of Achilles, in particular his tenderness and his king-like dignity.  Thus, the fact that such a fictional character does not exist in physical nature does not eliminate its usefulness for illuminating the moral nature of the epic hero.  The presence of the Phoenix is also justified, in a similar manner, by the cultural context of the poem’s genesis and setting.  The dialogue between the Phoenix and the warrior is perfectly logical within the religious presuppositions of the ancient Greek world.  It is this world, not the more skeptical world of eighteenth-century France, which art must imitate in Homer’s poetry.

c. Theory of Language

Like her mimetic theory of art, Dacier’s theory of language contests the rationalist thesis that ideal speech provides a clear one-to-one correspondence between a particular object and its linguistic signifier.  Dacier insists on the necessity and value of metaphorical speech, even outside the domain of poetry.

Metaphorical speech often communicates truths which cannot be expressed by more literal speech.  The frequent use of analogy is necessary for the effective communication of moral  truths which elude reduction to straightforward description.  “To depict well the objects of which one speaks, there is no method more certain than to provide images by comparison.  Does poetry alone use it?  Doesn’t eloquent oration use it just as much?  Doesn’t God use it?  Aren’t the divine Scriptures full of it?  Didn’t Our Lord use it again and again in his discourses?” [CCT]  The repeated use of metaphor in the Bible itself confirms the propriety of the recourse to metaphor in various types of religious and secular speech.

Dacier mocks the rationalists like La Motte who condemn metaphorical speech as a species of obscurantism.  “Should we say, like these literalist minds, that these [biblical] comparisons illuminate nothing and that it would have been better for the Holy Spirit to have made a plain depiction of these objects than to have had recourse to these misleading similarities?...Should we be so sure that these comparisons are imperfect and that they only serve to confuse matters rather than to clarify them?...Doesn’t one sense the awful impiety of such a position?  It is not without reason that Scripture calls impiety ignorance” [CCT].  The effort to eliminate metaphorical speech in favor of more literal language reflects the incapacity to grasp the moral realities and religious mysteries only communicated through elaborate simile.  The conceits of Scripture provide the inspired models for this metaphorical use of language to evoke the spiritual.

Rather than being inferior to clear propositional language in revealing the truth, poetry is actually more powerful than philosophy.  Homer reveals the capacity of poetry to unveil the true through the use of analogy.  “No poet has been more successful than him [Homer] in depicting objects by similarity.  Could the most philosophical discourse give a stronger and livelier picture of these objects than the images he draws in the mind through these comparisons?” [CCT]  Rather than representing confusion, metaphorical speech in the hands of a master like Homer evokes complex spiritual truths which more prosaic speech cannot express.

Dacier also defends metaphorical speech because it has the power to touch the emotions and will of the reader as well as his or her intellect.  Rather than conveying simple information, metaphorical rhetoric possesses a persuasive power absent in more literal forms of communication.  The value of metaphorical speech in the moral and religious realms lies in its capacity to shape the action of the moral agent and to convert the sinner.

d. Moral Pedagogy of Literature

For Dacier, the study of classical literature is essential to shape the moral character of the members of society, especially its governing elite.  Against the criticism that both Greek culture and literature are marked by immorality, Dacier defends the moral probity of classical Greek authors and their capacity to foster virtue in their readers.  Against the theological argument that the Greek pantheon and the authors it inspired feature immoral deities, Dacier claims that the theology of classical Greek poetry is closer to that of Christian monotheism than its modern critics would admit.

Homer epitomizes the moral value of the Greek classics.  “No philosopher has given greater precepts of morality than has Homer….Everyone [except modern critics] has recognized that the Iliad and the Odyssey art two quite perfect tableaux of human life.  With admirable variety, they represent everything that is worthy of praise or blame, that is useful or pernicious, in a word all the evils which madness can produce and all the goods which wisdom can cause” [CCT].  As evidence of Homeric passages promoting virtue, Dacier cites the prudence and wisdom apparent in King Nestor’s discourses in the Iliad and the Odyssey.

According to Dacier, La Motte and other modern critics of Homer have seriously misunderstood the moral structure of Homer’s epics and the classical Greek society they mirror.  In particular, they have misconstrued the moral nature of the epic hero Achilles.  Rather than being a model for moral imitation by the reader, Achilles is in fact a warning against the destructiveness of the vices of vanity, temerity, and arrogance with which Homer has clothed his character.  Dacier cites her philosophical guide Aristotle in this interpretation of Achilles as a salutary warning against vice.  “Did Aristotle ignore the continual emotional eruptions of Achilles?  Where did Aristotle consider them a virtue?  Undoubtedly, he made us see that the character of Achilles must represent not what a man does in anger, but rather everything anger itself can do.  Consequently, he considered this hero the brutal opposite of the man who does good” [CCT].  The modern dismissal of classical Greek literature as morally damaging is based upon such basic misinterpretations of the moral character of the epic and tragic hero.

Dacier defends the theological as well as the moral probity of Homer’s epics.  Against the common Christian charge that classical literature features a pantheon of violent, vicious deities, she insists that Homer actually provides a portrait of God and of the human soul which accords with the biblical prophets and apostles on numerous points.  “Homer recognizes one superior God, on which all the other gods are dependant.  Everywhere he supports human freedom and the concept of a double destiny so necessary to harmonize this freedom with predestination; the immortality of the soul; and punishments and rewards after death.  He recognized the great truth that human beings have nothing good which they have not received from God; that it is from God that comes all the success in what they undertake; that they must request this happy outcome by their prayers; and that the misfortune which occurs to them is called down by their folly and by the improper use they make of their freedom” [CCT].  Given its sound theology and moral psychology, the epics of Homer and similar classical Greek works of literature can nurture the theological as well as the moral virtues essential for a Christian political order.

4. Reception and Interpretation

Since the late seventeenth century, Madame Dacier has been recognized as a preeminent classicist and translator.  The essayist Madame de Lambert praised her contemporary for having contradicted anti-intellectual stereotypes of women.  “I esteem Madame Dacier infinitely.  Our sex owes her a great deal.  She has protested against the common error which condemns us to ignorance.  As much as from contempt as from an alleged superiority, men have denied us all learning. Madame Dacier is an example proving that we are capable of learning.  She has associated erudition with good manners.” [New Reflections on Women, 1727]

Dacier received philosophical as well as literary recognition.  Gilles Ménage dedicated his History of Women Philosophers (1690) to Dacier under the accolade of “the most erudite woman in the present or the past.”  In his Philosophical Dictionary (1764), Voltaire argued that “Madame Dacier was no doubt a woman superior to her sex and she has done a great service to letters.”  Countless encyclopedias of women authors cite Dacier for her erudition and scholarly productivity but her philosophical reflection has received comparatively little attention.

Recent scholarship has continued this literary rather than philosophical focus on Dacier.  Garnier (2002), Hayes (2002), and Moore (2002) examine questions of translation during the querelle des anciens et des modernes.  Bury (1999) studies Dacier in the context of the role of women intellectuals in the period.

The challenge for a philosophical interpretation of Dacier is to analyze the theories of art, mimesis, language, and education developed in her more theoretical works.  There is also the historical challenge to explore the neo-Aristotelianism she defended in the aesthetic rather than the customary metaphysical realm.  Her role in diffusing Stoic philosophy through the translations of Plutarch and Marcus Aurelius she co-authored with her husband also merits further study.

5. References and Further Reading

All translations from French to English are by the author of this article.

a. Primary Sources

  • Dacier, Anne Le Fèvre, Des causes de la corruption du goût. Paris: Rigaud, 1714.
    • A digital version of this work is available online at Gallica: Bibliothèque numérique on the webpage of the Bibliothèque nationale de France.
  • Dacier, Anne Le Fèvre, Homère défendu contre l’apologie du Père Hardouin, ou la suite aux causes de la corruption du goût. Paris: Coignard, 1716.
    • A digital version of this work is available online at Gallica: Bibliothèque numérique on the webpage of the Bibliothèque nationale de France.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Bury, Emmanuel, “Madame Dacier,” in Femmes savantes, saviors de femmes: Du crépuscule de la Renaissance à l’aube des Lumières, ed. Colette Navitel. Geneva: Droz, 1999: 209-20.
    • The author analyzes Dacier in terms of leading women intellectuals of early modernity.
  • Garnier, Bruno, “Anne Dacier, un esprit moderne au pays des anciens,” in Portraits de traductrices, ed. Jean Delisle. Ottawa and Artois: Presse universitaire d’Ottawa and Artois Presse universitaire, 2002: 13-54.
    • The author focuses on Dacier’s methods of translation.
  • Hayes, Julie Candler, “Of Meaning and Modernity: Anne Dacier and the Homer Debate,” in Strategic Rewriting, ed. David Lee Rubin. Charlottesville, VA: Rookwood, 2002: 173-95.
    • The author studies Dacier’s principles of translation and role in the querelle des anciens et des modernes.
  • Moore, Fabienne, “Homer Revisited: Anne Le Fèvre Dacier’s Preface to Her Prose Translation of the Iliad in Early Eighteenth-Century France,” Studies in the Literary Imagination, Fall 2000; 33(2): 87-107.
    • The author analyzes the moral theories as well as the translation methods of Dacier.

Author Information

John J. Conley
Loyola University in Maryland
U. S. A.

Agnès Arnauld (1593—1671)

An abbess of the Jansenist convent of Port-Royal, Mère Agnès Arnauld developed an Augustinian philosophy shaped by the mystical currents of the French Counter-Reformation.  Her philosophy of God depicts a deity who is radically other than his creatures.  Only a negative theology, a theology of what God is not, can explore the divine attributes.  In her ethical theory, Mère Agnès contextualizes moral virtue by analyzing those religious virtues proper to a nun in a contemplative order.  Influenced by the mystical école française, the abbess stresses self-annihilation as the summit of the nun’s life of virtue.  In her legal writings tied to the reformation of the convent, the abbess defends the spiritual freedom of women.  Women are to enjoy vocational freedom, the freedom to pursue education, and the freedom to hold opinions on disputed theological questions.  Similarly, women are to enjoy substantial freedom in the exercise of their authority as superiors of convents.  During the persecution of the convent, Mère Agnès developed a moral code of resistance to abuses of power.  She details the conditions under which cooperation with illegitimate commands of civil or ecclesiastical authority could be tolerated or rejected.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Works
  3. Philosophical Themes
    1. Negative Theology
    2. Monastic Virtue Theory
    3. Law and Freedom
    4. Ethics of Resistance
  4. Interpretation and Relevance
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Biography

Born on December 31, 1593, Jeanne Arnauld was the third daughter of Antoine Arnauld the Elder and Marie Catherine Marion Arnauld.  From birth, the prominent family of jurists had designated the infant for an abbacy in a convent.  Through negotiations with King Henri IV and fraudulent transaction with the Vatican, in which documents attesting the candidate’s age were falsified, her maternal grandfather Simon Marion had Jeanne appointed the abbess of the Benedictine convent of Saint-Cyr in 1599.  Assuming her religious name of Mère Cathérine –Agnès de Saint-Paul (commonly known as Mère Agnès), the infant abbess took with relish to the liturgical offices and other practices of the monastery.

As her elder sister’s reform of Port-Royal became increasingly stormy, Mère Agnès devoted her time to supporting Mère Angélique in the work of Port-Royal’s transformation.  Sealing her commitment to monastic reform, Mère Agnès renounced the abbacy of Saint-Cyr in 1610, was clothed in the Cistercian habit of Port-Royal in 1611, and pronounced her vows as a member of the community in 1612.  Mère Agnès assisted her sister in governing the burgeoning convent through a series of major offices: mistress of novices, subprioress, and vicar abbess.

During the decade of the 1610s, Mère Agnès emerged as one of the convent’s leading spiritual directors.  Her extensive correspondence reveals the eclectic influences on her thought: the Jesuit Jean Suffren; the Capuchin Archange de Pembroke; and the Feuillant Eustache de Saint-Paul Assaline.  François de Sales influenced the characteristic moderation expressed in Mère Agnès’s judgments.  On issues of gender and mystical states, the central reference was Teresa of Avila.  Her Path of Perfection, Interior Castle, and Autobiography are repeatedly cited.

In the 1620s, the convent became more turbulent.  With the transfer of the convent from the rural valley of the Chevreuese to the Parisian Saint-Jacques neighborhood in 1625, the convent came under the influence of new Oratorian chaplains, notably Pierre de Bérulle and Charles de Condren.  A disciple of the Platonist Pseudo-Dionysius, Bérulle encouraged an apophatic mysticism, which stressed the incapacity of the human mind to know God through image or concept. Condren emphasized complete abandonment to God’s will, climaxed by self-annihilation.  During the Oratorian ascendancy (1625-1636), Sebastien Zamet, an episcopal overseer of the convent and an ally of the Oratorians, pushed the convent in a less austere direction.  Liturgical offices became more complicated, church decorations became more sumptuous, and nuns were encouraged to share their latest mystical insights with devout laity in the front parlors.  The original reformers quietly fumed at what they considered a regression toward conventual decadence.

During the Oratorian ascendancy, Mère Agnès composed a small treatise, Private Chaplet of the Blessed Sacrament, under the direction of Condren.  Honoring Christ in the Eucharist, each of the sixteen stanzas devoted itself to the sixteen centuries elapsed since the Last Supper.  At Condren’s suggestion, the pious litany was expanded; the nun explained the meaning of the various apophatic titles ascribed to God. [An apophatic theology considers God to be ineffable, and it attempts to describe God in terms of what God is not.]   As the Chaplet quietly circulated among the nuns and lay benefactors of Port-Royal, a crisis erupted in 1633.  Octave Bellegarde, another episcopal supervisor of Port-Royal who disapproved of Zamet’s reform and of the Oratorians’ speculative mysticism, denounced the pamphlet as heretical and temerarious.  In June 1633, a committee of the theology faculty of the Sorbonne condemned Mère Agnès’s text as destructive of morals because of its stress on passive abandonment to God.  The Jesuit Étienne Binet seconded the condemnation, while the Jansenist Jean de Hauranne, abbé de Saint-Cyran vigorously defended the orthodoxy of the treatise.  The Vatican’s halfhearted intervention into the pamphlet war pleased neither party.  Mère Agnès’s text was withdrawn from circulation but neither was its theology condemned nor was it placed on the Index of Forbidden Books.

During her first abbacy over Port-Royal (1636-42), Mère Agnès restored the convent to the austerity of the Angelican reform.  Her relationship with the convent’s new chaplain, however, proved less than amicable.  A close friend and disciple of Cornelius Jansen, bishop of Ypres and Louvain theologian, Saint-Cyran imported the radical Augustinian theology of Jansen into the convent.  This theology’s emphasis on practical morality and the value of occasional deprivation of the sacraments clashed with the abbess’s more exuberant mystical piety.  By the time of Saint-Cyran’s imprisonment by Richelieu (1638-43), however, Mère Agnès had become a partisan of the Jansenist movement and intensified the convent’s cult of Saint-Cyran through the circulation of his letters and conferences.

At the end of her abbacy, Mère Agnès was appointed the convent’s mistress of novices.  The nun flourished in this role of spiritual counselor both through conversation with the novices and through correspondence with an extended number of correspondents.  Her letters to Jacqueline Pascal on the proper moment for entering Port-Royal express the prudence and moderation for which the nun was renowned: “Our Lord wants to purify you by this delay because you have not always desired it.  It is necessary to have a hunger and thirst for justice to expiate the disgust one once had for this vocation in earlier times.  Saint Augustine wonderfully describes this delay of God’s grace in the souls of those who desire the abundance of God’s grace, which God has postponed [L; to Jacqueline Pascal; February 25, 1650].”  Through her correspondence, the nun also participated in the philosophical and theological controversies of the day swirling around the publication of Antoine Arnauld’s Frequent Communion and Jean Brisacier’s Jansenism Confounded.

When Mère Agnès assumed her second abbacy of Port-Royal (1658-1681), the controversy over Jansenism had erupted into a crisis.  The French throne demanded that every priest, nun, and teacher in the realm sign a statement assenting to the Vatican’s condemnation of five heretical propositions found in Jansens’s massive Augustinus (published posthumously in 1640).  Using an ingenious theological distinction, Antoine Arnauld the Younger argued that members of the church were only bound to assent to church judgments of droit (concerning faith and morals); they were not bound to accept church judgments of fait (empirical fact).  The first type of judgments was essential to the church’s mission of salvation, whereas the second was not.  In the “crisis of the signature,” the Jansenists were willing to assent to the condemnation of the five theses concerning grace and freedom, but they could not assent to the erroneous judgment that Jansen had supported such heresies.   Mère Agnès indicates her refusal to giving an unreserved signature to the controversial document.  “The church is attacked in truth and charity, the two columns that support it.  This is what they are trying to destroy by this unfortunate signature, which we would offer against the truth and thereby destroy the charity we should have for the dead as well as the living.  We would be subscribing to the condemnation of a holy bishop who never taught the heresies they impute to him [L; to Madame de Foix; December 10, 1662].”

As the 1660s progressed, Mère Agnès witnessed the progressive intensification of the persecution of the convent.  The convent school and novitiate were closed; the chaplains were expelled.  Foreign nuns hostile to Jansenism were imported to govern Port-Royal, now surrounded by an armed guard.  The most recalcitrant nuns, including Mère Agnès, were exiled to foreign convents.  Mère Agnès herself was placed with the Visitation nuns; she refused to sign the controversial statement although some of her own nieces in the convent eventually yielded.  By the end of the 1660s, a truce was arranged to resolve the growing scandal of an entire convent under interdict.  In 1669, the “Peace of the Church” permitted the reopening of the convent, the resumption of liturgical life, and the reopening of the convent school and novitiate.  Several uncharacteristically placid years descended on Port-Royal.

Mère Agnès Arnauld died on February 19, 1671.

2. Works

A prolific author, Mère Agnès was one of the few Port-Royal nuns to see her works published during her lifetime.  Circulating first as a devotional pamphlet, Private Chaplet of the Blessed Sacrament (1626) caused an international dispute over its controversial apophatic approach to the divine attributes.  Louvain, the Jansenists, and the Oratorians defended the work, while the Jesuits and the Sorbonne opposed it.  Working in collaboration with Mère Angélique Arnauld and Antoine Arnauld, Mère Agnès was the principal author of the Constitutions of Port-Royal (1665), the legal framework for the Angelican reform of the convent and a theological text marked by the abbess’s Oratorian insistence on the annihilation of oneself.  Her Image of a Perfect and an Imperfect Nun (1665) provides the fullest exposition of her virtue theory.  The contemplative virtues central to the monastic life, especially the spirit of adoration, are stressed; to be authentic, virtue must empty itself of all self-interest.  Her accent on the intellectual nature of religious contemplation provoked a new controversy.  Martin de Barcos (1696) and Jean Desmarets de Saint-Sorlin (1665) criticized her approach as too intellectualist; Pierre de Nicole (1679) defended her use of reason in meditation.  The Spirit of Port-Royal (1665) underscores self-annihilation in its treatment of the spiritual character of the convent community.

The posthumously published works of Mère Agnès also make a single contribution to the philosophical and theological canon of Port-Royal.  An exercise in moral casuistry, Counsels on the Conduct Which the Nuns Should Maintain in the Event of a Change in the Governance of the Convent (1718) tackles the problem of moral cooperation with evil as it analyzes which actions would be legitimate and illegitimate in obeying the civil and ecclesiastical authorities who were persecuting the convent.  The two-volume Letters of Mère Agnès Arnauld, abbess of Port-Royal (1858) reflects the Augustinian axis of the abbess’s philosophy.   She repeatedly refers to the texts of Saint Augustine himself and modern Augustinian writers such as Jansen, Saint-Cyran, Antoine Arnauld, and Teresa of Avila in justifying her positions on spiritual government and theological controversy.

3. Philosophical Themes

The philosophical reflection of Mère Agnès Arnauld follows two primary avenues: philosophy of God and moral philosophy.  Influenced by the apophatic theology of the Oratorians, her philosophy of God stresses God’s alterity (otherness) and the incapacity of human concepts to penetrate the divine essence.  Her moral philosophy develops a theocentric account of the virtues central to the monastic life.  It also presents a casuistic analysis of the permissible and impermissible modes of cooperation with the persecutors of Port-Royal.

a. Negative Theology

In the Private Chaplet of the Blessed Sacrament [PC], Mère Agnès provides the most substantial expression of her apophatic theology.  A devotional treatise written in praise of Christ’s presence in the Eucharist, the Private Chaplet stresses the negative attributes of God disclosed in the eucharistic Christ.  The adorer of the Eucharist cannot penetrate the essence of the godhead, affirmed more accurately by terms expressing what he is not than by those expressing what he is.

A series of titles express this divine unknowability.  God is inaccessible. “He remains in himself, letting creatures remain in the incapacity to approach him [PC no.11].”  God is incomprehensible.  “He alone knows his ways.  He justifies to himself alone the plans he has for his creatures [PC no.12].”  God is entirely sovereign.  “He acts as the first cause without any subordination to the ends he has given himself [PC no.13].”  Other negative divine attributes include illimitability, inapplicability, and incommunicability.

Even the positive attributes ascribed to God receive an apophatic reinterpretation.  God’s holiness is entirely other than the alleged holiness of certain human creatures.  “The company God wants to keep with humanity is separate from it.  He resides only in himself.  It is not reasonable that God should approach us because we are only sin [PC no.1].”  The existence allegedly shared by both God and creatures is illusory.  Divine existence only manifests the non-being of creatures, especially peccatory human creatures.  “God is everything he wants to be and makes all other beings disappear.  As the sun blots out all other light, God exists simply to exist [PC no.4].”  The analogy of being disappears in this exaltation of divine alterity.

Throughout her writings, Mère Agnès emphasizes the rupture between God and human beings.  Analogical presentations of the divine attributes are inevitably anthropomorphic projections of human attributes into the divine essence.  As in the act of adoration before the Eucharist, the primary act of metaphysical affirmation of God is the adorer’s humble recognition of his or her utter incapacity to imagine or name the magnum mysterium that is the cause and the end of cosmic and human existence.  Only the language of negation and alterity can prevent both piety and philosophical reflection from deteriorating into imaginary projection.

b. Monastic Virtue Theory

In Image of a Perfect and an Imperfect Nun [IP], Mère Agnès analyzes the moral virtues proper to a nun committed to a strictly cloistered community.  Her distinction between the perfect and imperfect is not the one between virtue and vice.  The dividing line between authentic virtue and its subtle counterfeits lies in the difference between theocentric and anthropocentric postures of the will.

The monastic virtue of reverence illustrates the difference.  Both perfect and imperfect nuns practice their external obligations of divine worship and of reverence for their superiors.   The perfect focus on God alone, ignoring other creatures “as if they did not exist [IP, 7].”  The imperfect, however, suffer from a vacillating attention that “desires something other than God and that fears losing something other than God that pleases them [IP, 10].”  This anthropocentric turning on oneself corrupts the virtue that should be purely focused on God.

Other monastic virtues exemplify the split between anthropocentric and theocentric versions of virtue.  Perfect submission to the divine will accepts the periods of aridity and desolation which characterize spiritual maturation.  Imperfect submission, however, bridles at such deprivation and clings to sensible consolations.  Perfect zeal desires nothing other than the glory of God.  Imperfect zeal becomes fascinated with the external means used to glorify God and seeks recognition for its efforts.  Perfect repentance firmly renounces all sin and seeks solitude to reform one’s life.  Imperfect repentance vacillates and cannot give finality to its vague, contradictory desires for reform.  Recalling Pascal, Mère Agnès describes the vacillation of the imperfect soul: “Her mind is like a reed shaken by the wind, which makes it turn now this way and now that [IP, 53].”

This anti-anthropocentric account of virtue ultimately celebrates the annihilation of the self in the perfect practice of the monastic virtues.  Authentic humility entails recognition of one’s utter dependence on God for the least moral action.  “It is on this incapacity to perform the least good and to avoid the least evil without God’s help that the true nun establishes the unshakable foundation of humility [IP, 94].”  Similarly, authentic poverty acknowledges one’s utter non-existence in face of God.  “It is the knowledge that she has nothing that was hers before she was created out of nothing,  especially since the sin of Adam, who made all humanity worthy of not only losing the goods of heaven but of losing the goods of earth as well [IP, 100].”  Clearly influenced by the Oratorian spirituality of annihilation, the abbess depicts perfect virtue as a collapse of the moral agent into the divine will.

At the apex of the monastic virtues lie the contemplative virtues of solitude and adoration.  Authentic solitude permits the nun to recognize her utter uselessness in the face of God’s grandeur.  “God reduces us to be totally useless so that we might experience what the Prophet says: ‘Since the Lord is God, he has no need of our goods.’  This is to say that no matter how excellent our works may be, they provide no benefit to him; they are only advantageous for ourselves [IP, 148].”  In the act of adoration, the perfect nun experiences this self-annihilation in its fullest; she also discovers the source of this abolition of the human self in God’s operation of grace in the cross of Christ.  “She hears the voice of her Savior, who commands her to announce his death through her voluntary death to all things and to herself until he comes, which is to say, until she dies in her body.  He further tells us to find her glory and her rest only in the cross, in humiliation and privation of what she loves.  She should do so out of love for the one who dispossessed himself of his own glory, who annihilated himself, and who died for her salvation [IP, 160].”

This account of virtue is Augustinian in its stress on the utter necessity of grace for the performance of any moral action.  The “natural” virtues of prudence, fortitude, temperance, and justice are notable by their absence since they are illusory manifestations of pride.  The account is Oratorian inasmuch as it stresses the annihilation of the self as the key trait of the moral agent perfectly united to God in the practice of virtue.  It is also contemplative inasmuch as it integrates the practice of the moral virtues into the gaze of the adorer who knows through speculative experience and divine illumination how radically all good dispositions and good actions are caused by the sovereign godhead.  This architectural contemplative gaze simultaneously recognizes the utter nothingness of the human agent distorted by sin and concupiscence.

c. Law and Freedom

As the principal author of the Constitutions of the Monastery of Port-Royal [CM],. Mère Agnès crafted the basic legal structure for the reformed convent.  The piecemeal reforms effected by her sister Mère Angélique would now be embedded in a legal document recognized by ecclesiastical authority.  In the Constitutions, Mère Agnès also sketches her philosophy of freedom and rights in a gendered key.  The freedom of women to pursue a vocation, to develop a theological culture, and to exercise limited self-government are affirmed.  In particular, the authority of the convent’s abbess to govern and instruct her nuns without external interference is underscored.

Rooted in the Angelican reform, the Constitutions emphasize the vocational freedom of women.  The convent will only accept women who have indicated their desire to pursue a monastic calling free of parental pressure.  “We should not admit any girl if she is not truly called by God.  She should show by her life and actions a true and sincere desire to serve God.  Without this we should never admit anyone for any other reason, even when it is a question of the intelligence, the wealth, or the noble title the candidate might bring [CM, 54].”  To emphasize this vocational freedom, the Constitutions abolish the dowry requirement, long traditional for choir nuns in Benedictine and Cistercian convents.  “If a poor but excellent girl, clearly called by God, presents herself for admission, we should not refuse her, although the convent would be heavily burdened.  We would then hope that God who sent her would feed her.  We should not be afraid to make such commitments as long as we choose souls carefully and only accept souls rich in virtue instead of temporal advantages [CM, 74].”  Although this policy of vocational freedom faithfully followed the canon law of the church, it shocked French aristocratic opinion, long accustomed to placing unmotivated widows and surplus daughters in convents through the gift of a dowry.

Similarly, the education of women in Port-Royal’s convent school was to respect this vocational freedom.  The school was to accept only pupils whose parents had not already designated them for the married or cloistered life.  “We will only accept those girls whose parents offer them to God in indifference: that is, indifference as to whether they have decided to become nuns or whether they have decided to return to the world [CM, 99].”  For Mère Agnès, the major purpose of the convent school was to permit the pupils to discern their personal vocations through prayer, sacramental life, and dialogue with the teaching nuns.

The Constitutions also stress the spiritual freedom of the individual nun in her times of personal prayer.  In a period when many religious orders minutely prescribed methods of meditation, Mère Agnès insisted on the spontaneity and freedom which a nun must enjoy as she advances in prayerful maturity.  “Saint Benedict’s intention was that we should give the Holy Spirit room and time to stir up in us the spirit of meditation, which consists in a sincere desire to belong to God and to do so in purity and compunction of heart….True meditation is a celestial gift and not a human one.  It is the Holy Spirit praying for us when he makes us pray [CM, 43].”  Like virtue, prayer is theocentric in its very causation.  A certain illuminism emerges in this Augustinian account of prayer.

To exercise this contemplative freedom, the nun must develop an extensive theological culture.  In a period when personal meditation on Scripture was still considered suspect, Mère Agnès stipulates a comparatively wide number of theological texts to be studied by the nuns.  In addition to biblical reading, nuns are to meditate on works from the patristic period (Augustine, the desert fathers, Dorotheus and Bernard of Clairvaux) and the modern period (François de Sales, Louis of Grenada, and Teresa of Avila).

The nuns are also to enjoy limited self-governance.  The abbesses are to be elected by the nuns meeting in chapter.  The term of office was now to be fixed at three years, renewable for one additional term.  Although the bishop appoints a clerical overseer for the convent, the overseer is to be chosen from a list of three names presented by the abbess.  Similarly, the abbess is to exercise the right of approval for the chaplains and confessors who serve the convent.  The authority of the abbess in the reformed convent is especially pronounced.  She is to serve as the nuns’ principal spiritual director and to enjoy an extensive teaching role.  She is to provide lectures commenting on key monastic texts, such as the Rule of Saint Benedict.  In the conférence, one of the reformed Port-Royal’s creations, the abbess is to field the question of her fellow nuns on both practical and speculative issues troubling the convent.

So strong was the reformed convent’s accent on theological culture and debate that critics derided the Port-Royal nuns as théologiennes.  In Mère Agnès’ perspective, the authentic nun is the woman who freely pursues a personal vocation, who strengthens this vocation through substantial theological study, who chooses her own superiors, and who pursues God in spontaneous meditation guided by the Holy Spirit.  The challenge to the patriarchal tradition of the forced vocation and the illiterate convent was evident.

Even in her legal texts, the Augustinian philosophy of Mère Agnès is evident.  The Constitutions are not a blueprint for human efforts to build the ideal convent; they reflect the work of divine grace within the reformers.  “As Saint Augustine says, we must work to conquer our vices by constant efforts and ardent prayers, but we must recognize at the same time that our efforts as well as our prayers, if there is anything good in them, are the effects of grace [CM, 273].” Corporate, no less than individual, acts of virtue have a single causation in the operation of divine grace.

d. Ethics of Resistance

As the opposition to Port-Royal intensified, Mère Agnès composed Counsels on the Conduct Which Nuns Should Maintain in the Event of a Change in the Governance of the Convent [CC].  The work attempted to prepare the nuns to negotiate the persecutions which would soon overwhelm the convent.  Mère Agnès presciently saw the exile of recalcitrant nuns, the imposition of foreign superiors, and the use of ecclesiastical interdict (barring a Christian from participation in the sacraments) as probable tactics of the new persecution.  Her Counsels functions both as a casuistical manual, which instructs nuns on acceptable and unacceptable scenarios of cooperation with hostile authorities, and a moral exhortation, which analyzes the virtues the nuns should cultivate under duress.

If foreign superiors are imposed on the convent, the Port-Royal nuns should refuse to acknowledge their authority.  Such imposed superiors represent a violation of the convent’s constitutions, which have been duly approved by the Vatican and the French throne.  “These superiors cannot have a true authority by usurping a power that does not belong to them.  They will be intruders, even when they want to adorn themselves with the obedience due superiors [CC, 83].”  The nuns of Port-Royal have not pledged to follow generic vows of poverty, chastity, and obedience; with the approval of church and state, they have promised to live these vows in the convent of Port-Royal, ruled by its constitutions and laws.  The imposition of foreign superiors represents a serious violation of this vocational right.

In practice, the nun must distinguish between acceptable and unacceptable cooperation in the commands of these illegitimate superiors.  Material cooperation is the easiest.  The nun should quickly accept commands concerning manual labor, meals, and physical disposition of one’s space.  Even here, however, the nun must refuse commands to activities incompatible with the ethos of Port-Royal; making elaborate vestments or placing flowers on the altar, for example, would violate the convent’s austere understanding of poverty.  Moral cooperation with the illegitimate superiors should be refused.  The nun is not to reveal her convictions or feelings to the illegitimate superiors or their attendant clergy.  If a command is refused, no explanation is to be given.  Under no circumstances should the nun agree to submit to the demand of an unreserved signature on the statement assenting to the church’s condemnation of Jansen; to do so would be to deny the truth concerning grace.  Even conversations on this topic are to be avoided.

The problem of material cooperation when one is exiled to a foreign convent is comparatively easier.  A legitimate superior of a foreign convent exercises a certain authority over the entire house, including the guests who reside there.  An exiled Port-Royal nun should easily accept the host convent’s different material culture, even to the point of breaking the reformed Port-Royal’s vegetarianism, and different spiritual culture, including participation in a different version of the divine office than that used at Port-Royal.  Even here, however, a strict silence should be employed to avoid any moral cooperation with Port-Royal’s persecutors.  If an exiled nun confesses her sin to the convent’s confessor, she should not reveal anything else in her conscience except her sins, soberly described.  Interviews with the new superior should be respectful but the exiled nun should not reveal her internal state of mind.  An asceticism of the tongue is essential in this genteel campaign of resistance.

The abbess also reminds the nuns of the virtues they need to cultivate during the impending persecution.  They need to acquire the virtues of the martyrs who have preceded them.  “God clearly permits us to be consoled by the thought that we are suffering because we feared to offend him by assenting against our conscience to something we thought impossible to do without attacking the truth [CC, 104].”  In refusing to assent to the condemnation of what they believed to be Jansen’s accurate theory of grace, the nuns have become the most modern of victims: the martyr to conscience.

The persecution also gives the nuns the occasion to deepen the virtues of humility and of dependence on God’s providence.  Most strikingly, the deprivation of Holy Communion (as part of the censure of interdict) permits the nuns to discover an asacramental type of communion with Christ that seems to transcend the value of sacramental communion.  “Instead of the bread of God, we receive the word of God himself, which must be heard in our heart….We place our confidence in the promise made to us in Holy Scripture that the spiritual anointing, even greater in affliction, will teach us everything [CC, 95].” Under the brunt of persecution, the piety of the nun becomes a comparatively antinomian type of piety, no longer requiring the sacramental or sacerdotal meditation of the church to experience intimate communion with God.

4. Interpretation and Relevance

Several factors have limited the reception and interpretation of the works of Mère Agnès Arnauld as properly philosophical works.  First, a number of secondary works have focused exclusively on the controversy over the nun’s early pamphlet Private Chaplet of the Blessed Sacrament. The commentaries by Saint-Cyran (1633), Binet (1635), Armogathe (1991), and Lesaulnier (1994) indicate the longstanding interest in the church-state controversy behind this international quarrel.  This focus on the ecclesiastical politics behind the abbess’s early work has tended to devalorize the more detailed positions on virtue and authority developed by Mère Agnès in her works of maturity.  Second, the Jansenist movement itself often distanced itself from the works of the nun, considered too mystical for the practical, rationalist piety of the Jansenist mainstream.  Barcos’s (1696) critique of Mère Agnès’s theories of prayer indicates the disdain of the later Jansenist movement for a mysticism-oriented philosophy too dependent on its Oratorian sources.

The contemporary philosophical retrieval of the thought of Mère Agnès is focusing more on her work as a moralist.  Her virtue theory privileges those intellectual and volitional habits that typify the way of life proper to a strictly cloistered convent.  Contemplation itself, interpreted as a loving gaze on God freed from all self-interest, becomes the keystone of the authentic virtuous life.  As Mesnard (1994) argues, the more active dimension of the life of the embattled nun merits new consideration.  Her reflections on the quandaries of material cooperation with evil constitute a casuistry for the oppressed.  The ethics of resistance she constructed during the persecution of Port-Royal remains to be explored.

5. References and Further Reading

All translations from French to English above are by the author of this article.

a. Primary Sources

  • Arnauld, Mère Agnès. Avis donnés par la Mère Cathérine Agnès de Saint-Paul, Sur la conduite que les   religieuses doivent garder, au cas qu’il arrivât du changement dans le gouvernement de sa maison (N.p.: 1718).
    • [The treatise analyzes the morality of material cooperation with the opponents of the convent.]
  • Arnauld, Mère Agnès. Counsels on the Conduct Which the Nuns Should Maintain in the Event of a Change in the Governance of the Convent.1718.
  • Arnauld, Mère Agnès. L’image d’une religieuse parfait et d’une imparfaite, avec les occupations intérieures pour toute la journée (Paris: Charles Savreux, 1665.)
    • [This work analyzes the difference between theocentric and anthropocentric virtue, with the accent placed on the Oratorian virtue of self-annihilation.]
  • Arnauld, Mère Agnès. Les constitutions du monastère de Port-Royal du Saint-Sacrement (Mons: Gaspard Migeot, 1665.)
    • [Written with the collaboration of Antoine Arnauld and Mère Angélique Arnauld, this juridical document provides the legal framework for the reformed Port-Royal convent.]
  • Arnauld, Mère Agnès. Lettres de la Mère Agnès Arnauld, abbesse de Port-Royal, ed. Prosper Faugère [and Rachel Galet], 2 vols. (Paris: Benjamin Duprat, 1858).
    • [The correspondence indicates the broad Augustinian culture of the abbess as well as the principles of her methods of governance and of spiritual direction.]
  • Arnauld, Mère Agnès. Private Chaplet of the Blessed Sacrament (1626).
  • Arnauld, Mère Agnès. Spirit of Port-Royal (1665).

b. Secondary Sources

  • Armogathe, Robert. “Le chapelet secret de Mère Agnès Arnauld,” XVIIe siècle no. 170 (1990): 77-86.
    • [The article provides an excellent critical edition of the Private Chaplet and an analysis of the work’s theology of rupture.]
  • Barcos, Martin de. Les sentiments de l’abbé Philérème sur l’oraison mentale (Cologne: P. Du Marteau, 1696).
    • [The Jansenist leader criticizes Mère Agnès’s approach to meditation as too methodical and too intellectualist.]
  • Binet, Étienne. Discussion sommaire d’un livret intitulé “Le chapelet secret du très-saint Sacrement” (Paris: 1635).
    • [The Jesuit author criticizes Mère Agnès’s Private Chaplet for its alleged asacramentalism and discouragement of the cultivation of the moral virtues.]
  • Bugnion-Sécretan, Perle. Mère Agnès Arnauld, 1593-1672; Abbesse de Port-Royal. (Paris: Cerf, 1996).
    • [This biography uses Mère Agnès’s correspondence to probe the abbess’s psychological life.]
  • Conley, John J. Adoration and Annihilation: The Convent Philosophy of Port-Royal (Notre Dame, IN: University of Notre Dame Pres, 2009): 113-174.
    • [This chapter analyzes Mère Agnès’s Augustinian philosophy, especially its theory of virtue, freedom, and the divine attributes.]
  • Chédozeau, Bernard. “Aux sources du Traité de l’oraison de Pierre Nicole: Martin de Barcos et Jean Desmarets de Saint-Sorlin lecteurs des Occupations intérieures de la Mère Agnès Arnauld,” Chroniques de Port-Royal 43 (1994): 123-34.
    • [The article traces the influence of Mère Agnès’s spirituality on subsequent controversies over the nature of Christian contemplation.]
  • Desmarets de Saint-Sorlin, Jean. Le chemin de la paix et celui de l’inquiétude, vol. 1 (Paris: C. Audinet, 1665).
    • [The book condemns Mère Agnès’s theories of prayer as too rationalistic.]
  • Lesaulnier, Jean. “Le chapelet secret de la Mère Agnès Arnauld,” Chroniques de Port-Royal 43 (1994): 9-23.
    • [The article provides a well-documented textual study of the various versions of and controversy over the abbess’s Private Chaplet.]
  • Mesnard, Jean. “Mère Agnès femme d’action,” Chroniques de Port-Royal 43 (1994): 57-80.
    • [Unlike other commentators, the author stresses the practical rather than the mystical dimension of Mère Agnès’s work and theories.]
  • Nicole, Pierre de. Traité de l’oraison (Paris: H. Josset, 1679).
    • [A leading Jansenist philosopher defends Mère Agnés’s spirituality as both doctrinally orthodox and philosophically sound.]
  • Saint-Cyran, Jean du Vergier de Haurranne, abbé de. Examen d’une apologie qui a été faite pour server de défense à un petit livre intitulé Le chapelet secret du Très-Saint Sacrement (Paris, 1633).
    • [A defense of the Augustinian pedigree and orthodoxy of Mère Agnès’s Private Chaplet, the work marked Saint-Cyran’s inaugural alliance with the convent of Port-Royal.]
  • Timmermans, Linda. “La ‘Religieuse Parfaite’ et la théologie: L’attitude de la Mère Agnès à l’égard de la participation aux controverses,” Chroniques de Port-Royal 43 (1994): 97-112.
    • [The commentary on Image of a Perfect Nun argues that the abbess desired nuns to abstain from theological disputes; Mère Agnès’s own participation in several such public disputes is downplayed.]
  • Weaver, F. Ellen. La Contre-Réforme et les constitutions de Port-Royal (Paris: Cerf, 2002.)
    • [This study stresses the link between the abbess’s vision of reformed conventual life and both the earlier Cistercian tradition and other “non-Jansenist” currents in the Counter-Reformation.]

Author Information

John J. Conley
Loyola University in Maryland
U. S. A.

Simone de Beauvoir (1908—1986)

beauvoirSimone de Beauvoir was one of the most preeminent French existentialist philosophers and writers. Working alongside other famous existentialists such as Jean-Paul Sartre, Albert Camus and Maurice Merleau-Ponty, de Beauvoir produced a rich corpus of writings including works on ethics, feminism, fiction, autobiography, and politics.

Beauvoir's method incorporated various political and ethical dimensions. In The Ethics of Ambiguity, she developed an existentialist ethics that condemned the “spirit of seriousness” in which people too readily identify with certain abstractions at the expense of individual freedom and responsibility.  In The Second Sex, she produced an articulate attack on the fact that throughout history women have been relegated to a sphere of “immanence,” and the passive acceptance of roles assigned to them by society.  In The Mandarins, she fictionalized the struggles of existents trapped in ambiguous social and personal relationships at the closing of World War II.  The emphasis on freedom, responsibility, and ambiguity permeate all of her works and give voice to core themes of existentialist philosophy.

Her philosophical approach is notably diverse. Her influences include French philosophy from Descartes to Bergson, the phenomenology of Edmund Husserl and Martin Heidegger, the historical materialism of Karl Marx and Friedrich Engels, and the idealism of Immanuel Kant and G. W. F Hegel. In addition to her philosophical pursuits, de Beauvoir was also an accomplished literary figure, and her novel, The Mandarins, received the prestigious Prix Goncourt award in 1954. Her most famous and influential philosophical work, The Second Sex (1949), heralded a feminist revolution and remains to this day a central text in the investigation of women's oppression and liberation.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Ethics
    1. Pyrrhus et Cineas
    2. The Ethics of Ambiguity
  3. Feminism
    1. The Second Sex
  4. Literature
    1. Novels
    2. Short Stories
    3. Theater
  5. Cultural Studies
    1. Travel Observations
    2. The Coming of Age
    3. Autobiographical Works
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Selected Works by Beauvoir (in French and English)
    2. Selected Books on Beauvoir in English

1. Biography

Simone de Beauvoir was born on January 9, 1908 in Paris to Georges Bertrand de Beauvoir and Françoise (née) Brasseur. Her father, George, whose family had some aristocratic pretensions, had once desired to become an actor but studied law and worked as a civil servant, contenting himself instead with the profession of legal secretary. Despite his love of the theater and literature, as well as his atheism, he remained a staunchly conservative man whose aristocratic proclivities drew him to the extreme right. In December of 1906 he married Françoise Brasseur whose wealthy bourgeois family offered a significant dowry that was lost in the wake of World War I. Slightly awkward and socially inexperienced, Françoise was a deeply religious woman who was devoted to raising her children in the Catholic faith. Her religious, bourgeois orientation became a source of serious conflict between her and her oldest daughter, Simone. [The British refer to Simone de Beauvoir as "de Beauvoir" and the Americans, as "Beauvoir."]

Born in the morning of January 9, 1908, Simone-Ernestine-Lucie-Marie Bertrand de Beauvoir was a precocious and intellectually curious child from the beginning. Her sister, Hélène (nicknamed "Poupette") was born two years later in 1910 and Beauvoir immediately took to intensely instructing her little sister as a student. In addition to her own independent initiative, Beauvoir's intellectual zeal was also nourished by her father who provided her with carefully edited selections from the great works of literature and who encouraged her to read and write from an early age. His interest in her intellectual development carried through until her adolescence when her future professional carrier, necessitated by the loss of her dowry, came to symbolize his own failure. Aware that he was unable to provide a dowry for his daughters, Georges' relationship with his intellectually astute eldest became conflicted by both pride and disappointment at her prospects. Beauvoir, on the contrary, always wanted to be a writer and a teacher, rather than a mother and a wife and pursued her studies with vigor. Beauvoir began her education in the private Catholic school for girls, the Institut Adeline Désir where she remained until the age of 17. It was here that she met Elizabeth Mabille (Zaza), with whom she shared an intimate and profound friendship until Zaza's untimely death in 1929. Although the doctor's blamed Zaza's death on meningitis, Beauvoir believed that her beloved friend had died from a broken heart in the midst of a struggle with her family over an arranged marriage. Zaza's friendship and death haunted Beauvoir for the rest of her life and she often spoke of the intense impact they had on her life and her critique of the rigidity of bourgeois attitudes towards women.

Beauvoir had been a deeply religious child as a result of her education and her mother's training; however, at the age of 14, she had a crisis of faith and decided definitively that there was no God. She remained an atheist until her death. Her rejection of religion was followed by her decision to pursue and teach philosophy. Only once had she considered marriage to her cousin, Jacques Champigneulle. She never again entertained the possibility of marriage, instead preferring to live the life of an intellectual.

Beauvoir passed the baccalauréat exams in mathematics and philosophy in 1925. She then studied mathematics at the Institut Catholique and literature and languages at the Institut Sainte-Marie, passing exams in 1926 for Certificates of Higher Studies in French literature and Latin, before beginning her study of philosophy in 1927. Studying philosophy at the Sorbonne, Beauvoir passed exams for Certificates in History of Philosophy, General Philosophy, Greek, and Logic in 1927, and in 1928, in Ethics, Sociology, and Psychology. She wrote a graduate diplôme on Leibniz for Léon Brunschvig and completed her practice teaching at the lycée Janson-de-Sailly with fellow students, Merleau-Ponty and Claude Lévi-Strauss - with both of whom she remained in philosophical dialogue.

In 1929, she took second place in the highly competitive philosophy agrégation exam, beating Paul Nizan and Jean Hyppolite and barely losing to Jean-Paul Sartre who took first (it was his second attempt at the exam). Unlike Beauvoir, all three men had attended the best preparatory (khâgne) classes for the agrégation and were official students at the École Normale Supérieure. Although she was not an official student, Beauvoir attended lectures and sat for the agrégation at the École Normale. At 21 years of age, Beauvoir was the youngest student ever to pass the agrégation in philosophy and thus became the youngest philosophy teacher in France.

It was during her time at the École Normale that she met Sartre. Sartre and his closed circle of friends (including René Maheu, who gave her her life-long nickname "Castor", and Paul Nizan) were notoriously elitist at the École Normale. Beauvoir had longed to be a part of this intellectual circle and following her success in the written exams for the agrégation in 1929, Sartre requested to be introduced to her. Beauvoir thus joined Sartre and his "comrades" in study sessions to prepare for the grueling public oral examination component of the agrégation. For the first time, she found in Sartre an intellect worthy (and, as she asserted, in some ways superior) to her own-a characterization that has lead to many ungrounded assumptions concerning Beauvoir's lack of philosophical originality. For the rest of their lives, they were to remain "essential" lovers, while allowing for "contingent" love affairs whenever each desired. Although never marrying (despite Sartre's proposal in 1931), having children together, or even living in the same home, Sartre and Beauvoir remained intellectual and romantic partners until Sartre's death in 1980.

The liberal intimate arrangement between her and Sartre was extremely progressive for the time and often unfairly tarnished Beauvoir's reputation as a woman intellectual equal to her male counterparts. Adding to her unique situation with Sartre, Beauvoir had intimate liaisons with both women and men. Some of her more famous relationships included the journalist Jacques Bost, the American author Nelson Algren, and Claude Lanzmann, the maker of the Holocaust documentary, Shoah.

In 1931, Beauvoir was appointed to teach in a lycée at Marseilles whereas Sartre's appointment landed him in Le Havre. In 1932, Beauvoir moved to the Lycée Jeanne d'Arc in Rouen where she taught advanced literature and philosophy classes. In Rouen she was officially reprimanded for her overt criticisms of woman's situation and her pacifism. In 1940, the Nazis occupied Paris and in 1941, Beauvoir was dismissed from her teaching post by the Nazi government. As a result of the effects of World War II on Europe, Beauvoir began exploring the problem of the intellectual's social and political engagement with his or her time.

Following a parental complaint made against her for corrupting one of her female students, she was dismissed from teaching again in 1943. She was never to return to teaching. Although she loved the classroom environment, Beauvoir had always wanted to be an author from her earliest childhood. Her collection of short stories on women, Quand prime le spirituel (When Things of the Spirit Come First) was rejected for publication and not published until many years later (1979). However, her fictionalized account of the triangular relationship between herself, Sartre and her student, Olga Kosakievicz, L'Invitée (She Came to Stay), was published in 1943. This novel, written from 1935 to 1937 (and read by Sartre in manuscript form as he began writing Being and Nothingness) successfully gained her public recognition.

The Occupation inaugurated what Beauvoir has called the "moral period" of her literary life. From 1941 to 1943 she wrote her novel, Le Sang des Autres (The Blood of Others), which was heralded as one of the most important existential novels of the French Resistance. In 1943 she wrote her first philosophical essay, an ethical treatise entitled Pyrrhus et Cinéas. Finally, this period includes the writing of her novel, Tous Les Hommes sont Mortels (All Men are Mortal), written from 1943-46 and her only play, Les Bouches Inutiles (Who Shall Die?), written in 1944.

Although only cursorily involved in the Resistance, Beauvoir's political commitments underwent a progressive development in the 1930's and 1940's. Together with Sartre, Maurice Merleau-Ponty, Raymond Aron and other intellectuals, she helped found the politically non-affiliated, leftist journal, Les Temps Modernes in 1945, for which she both edited and contributed articles, including in 1945, "Moral Idealism and Political Realism," "Existentialism and Popular Wisdom," and in 1946, "Eye for an Eye." Also in 1946, Beauvoir wrote an article explaining her method of doing philosophy in literature in "Literature and Metaphysics." The creation of this journal and her leftist orientation (which was heavily influenced by her reading of Marx and the political ideal represented by Russia), colored her uneasy relationship to Communism. The journal itself and the question of the intellectual's political commitments would become a major theme of her novel, The Mandarins (1954).

Beauvoir published another ethical treatise, Pour une Morale de l'Ambiguïté (The Ethics of Ambiguity) in 1947. Although she was never fully satisfied with this work, it remains one of the best examples of an existentialist ethics. In 1955, she published, "Must We Burn Sade?" which again approaches the question of ethics from the perspective of the demands of and obligations to the other.

Following advance extracts which appeared in Les Temps Modernes in 1948, Beauvoir published her revolutionary, two-volume investigation into woman's oppression, Le Deuxième Sexe (The Second Sex) in 1949. Although previous to writing this work she had never considered herself to be a "feminist," The Second Sex solidified her as a feminist figure for the remainder of her life. By far her most controversial work, this book was embraced by feminists and intellectuals, as well as mercilessly attacked by both the right and the left. The 70's, famous for being a time of feminist movements, was embraced by Beauvoir who participated in demonstrations, continued to write and lecture on the situation of women, and signed petitions advocating various rights for women. In 1970, Beauvoir helped launch the French Women's Liberation Movement in signing the Manifesto of the 343 for abortion rights and in 1973, she instituted a feminist section in Les Temps Modernes.

Following the numerous literary successes and the high profile of her and Sartre's lives, her career was marked by a fame rarely experienced by philosophers during their lifetimes. This fame resulted both from her own work as well as from her relationship to and association with Sartre. For the rest of her life, she lived under the close scrutiny of the public eye. She was often unfairly considered to be a mere disciple of Sartrean philosophy (in part, due to her own proclamations) despite the fact that many of her ideas were original and went in directions radically different than Sartre's works.

During the 1940's, she and Sartre, who had at one time relished in the café culture and social life of Paris, found themselves retreating into the safety of their close circle of friends, affectionately named the "Family." However, her fame did not stop her from continuing her life-long passion of traveling to foreign lands which resulted in two of her works, L'Amérique au Jour le Jour (America Day by Day) first published in 1948 and La Longue Marche (The Long March) published in 1957. The former was written following her lecture tour of the United States in 1947, and the latter following her visit with Sartre to communist China in 1955.

Her later work included the writing of more works of fiction, philosophical essays and interviews. It was notably marked not only by her political action in feminist issues, but also by the publication of her autobiography in four volumes and her political engagement directly attacking the French war in Algeria and the tortures of Algerians by French officers. In 1970, she published an impressive study of the oppression of aged members of society, La Vieillesse (The Coming of Age). This work mirrors the same approach she had taken in The Second Sex only with a different object of investigation.

Beauvoir saw the passing of her lifelong companion in 1980, which is recounted in her 1981 book, La Cérémonie des Adieux (Adieux: A Farewell to Sartre). Following the death of Sartre, Beauvoir officially adopted her companion, Sylvie le Bon, who became her literary executor. Beauvoir died of a pulmonary edema on April 14, 1986.

2. Ethics

a. Pyrrhus et Cineas

For most of her life, Beauvoir was concerned with the ethical responsibility that the individual has to him or herself, other individuals and to oppressed groups. Her early work, Pyrrhus et Cinéas (1944) approaches the question of ethical responsibility from an existentialist framework long before Sartre was to attempt the same endeavor. This essay was well-received as it spoke to a war-torn France that was struggling to find a way out of the darkness of War World II. It begins as a conversation between Pyrrhus, the ancient king of Epirus, and his chief advisor, Cineas, on the question of action. Each time Pyrrhus makes an assertion as to what land he will conquer, Cineas asks him what will he do afterwards? Finally, Pyrrhus exclaims that he will rest following the achievement of all of his plans, to which Cineas retorts, "Why not rest right away"? The essay is thus framed as an investigation into the motives of action and the existential concern with why we should act at all.

This work was written by a young Beauvoir in close dialogue with the Sartre of Being and Nothingness (1943). The framework of an individual freedom engaged in an objective world is close to Sartre's conception of the conflict between being-for-itself (l'être-pour-soi) and being-in-itself (l'être-en-soi). Differing from Sartre, Beauvoir's analysis of the free subject immediately implies an ethical consideration of other free subjects in the world. The external world can often manifest itself as a crushing, objective reality whereas the other can reveal to us our fundamental freedom. Lacking a God to guarantee morality, it is up to the individual existent to create a bond with others through ethical action. This bond requires a fundamentally active orientation to the world through projects that express our own freedom as well as encourage the freedom of our fellow human beings. Because to be human is essentially to rupture the given world through our spontaneous transcendence, to be passive is to live, in Sartrean terminology, in bad faith.

Although emphasizing key Sartrean motifs of transcendence, freedom and the situation in this early work, Beauvoir takes her enquiry in a different direction. Like Sartre, she believes that that human subjectivity is essentially a nothingness which ruptures being through spontaneous projects. This movement of rupturing the given through the introduction of spontaneous activity is called transcendence. Beauvoir, like Sartre, believes that the human being is constantly engaged in projects which transcend the factical situation (cultural, historical, personal, etc.) into which the existent is thrown. Yet, even though much of her nomenclature and ideas obviously emerge within a philosophical discourse with Sartre, her goal in writing Pyrrhus et Cinéas is somewhat different than his. Most notably, in Pyrrhus et Cinéas, she constructs an ethics, which is a project postponed by Sartre in Being and Nothingness. In addition, rather than seeing the other (who in his or her gaze turns me into an object) as a threat to my freedom as Sartre would have it, Beauvoir sees the other as the necessary axis of my freedom-without whom, in other words, I could not be free. With the goal of elucidating an existentialist ethics then, Beauvoir is concerned with questions of oppression that are largely absent in Sartre's early work.

Pyrrhus et Cinéas is a richly philosophical text which incorporates themes not only from Sartre, but also from Hegel, Heidegger, Spinoza, Voltaire, Nietzsche, and Kierkegaard. However, Beauvoir is as critical of these philosophers as she is admiring. For example, she criticizes Hegel for his unethical faith in progress which sublates the individual in the relentless pursuit of the Absolute. She criticizes Heidegger for his emphasis on being-towards-death as undermining the necessity of setting up projects, which are themselves ends and are not necessarily projections towards death.

Beauvoir emphasizes that one's transcendence is realized through the human project which sets up its own end as valuable, rather than relying on external validation or meaning. The end, therefore, is not something cut off from activity, standing as a static and absolute value outside of the existent who chooses it. Rather, the goal of action is established as an end through the very freedom which posits it as a worthwhile enterprise. Beauvoir maintains the existentialist belief in absolute freedom of choice and the consequent responsibility that such freedom entails, by emphasizing that one's projects must spring from individual spontaneity and not from an external institution, authority, or person. As such, she is sharply critical of the Hegelian absolute, the Christian conception of God and abstract entities such as Humanity, Country and Science which demand the individual's renunciation of freedom into a static Cause. All world-views which demand the sacrifice and repudiation of freedom diminish the reality, thickness, and existential importance of the individual existent. This is not to say that we should abandon all projects of unification and scientific advancement in favor of a disinterested solipsism, only that such endeavors must necessarily honor the individual existents of which they are composed. Additionally, instead of being forced into causes of various kinds, existents must actively and self-consciously choose to participate in them.

Because Beauvoir is so concerned in this essay with freedom and the necessity to self-consciously choose who one is at every moment, she takes up relationships of slavery, mastery, tyranny, and devotion which remain choices despite the inequalities that often result from these connections with others. Despite the inequity of power in such relationships, she maintains that we can never do anything for or against others, i.e., we can never act in the place of others because each individual can only be responsible for him or herself. However, we are still morally obligated to keep from harming others. Echoing a common theme in existentialist philosophy, even to be silent or to refuse to engage in helping the other, is still making a choice. Freedom, in other words, cannot be escaped.

Yet, she also develops the idea that in abstaining from encouraging the freedom of others, we are acting against the ethical call of the other. Without others, our actions are destined to fall back upon themselves as useless and absurd. However, with others who are also free, our actions are taken up and carried beyond themselves into the future-transcending the limits of the present and of our finite selves. Our very actions are calls to other freedoms who may choose to respond to or ignore us. Because we are finite and limited and there are no absolutes to which our actions can or should conform, we must carry out our projects in risk and uncertainty. But it is just this fragility that Beauvoir believes opens us up to a genuine possibility for ethics.

b. The Ethics of Ambiguity

In many ways, The Ethics of Ambiguity (1947) continues themes first developed in Pyrrhus et Cinéas. Beauvoir continues to believe in the contingency of existence in that there is no necessity that we exist and thus there is no predetermined human essence or standard of value. Of particular importance, Beauvoir expounds upon the idea that human freedom requires the freedom of others for it to be actualized. Although Beauvoir was never fully satisfied with The Ethics of Ambiguity, it remains a testament to her long-standing concern with freedom, oppression, and responsibility, as well as to the depth of her philosophical understanding of the history of philosophy and of her own unique contributions to it.

She begins this work by asserting the tragic condition of the human situation which experiences its freedom as a spontaneous internal drive that is crushed by the external weight of the world. Human existence, she argues, is always an ambiguous admixture of the internal freedom to transcend the given conditions of the world and the weight of the world which imposes itself on us in a manner outside of our control and not of our own choosing. In order for us to live ethically then, we must assume this ambiguity rather than try to flee it.

In Sartrean terms, she sets up a problem in which each existent wants to deny their paradoxical essence as nothingness by desiring to be in the strict, objective sense; a project that is doomed to failure and bad faith. In many ways, Beauvoir's task is to describe the existentialist conversion alluded to by Sartre in Being and Nothingness, but postponed until the much later, incomplete attempt in his Cahiers Pour une Morale. For Beauvoir, an existentialist conversion allows us to live authentically at the crossroads of freedom and facticity. This requires that we engage our freedom in projects which emerge from a spontaneous choice. In addition, the ends and goals of our actions must never be set up as absolutes, separate from we who choose them. In this sense, Beauvoir sets limits to freedom. To be free is not to have free license to do whatever one wants. Rather, to be free entails the conscious assumption of this freedom through projects which are chosen at each moment. The meaning of actions is thus granted not from some external source of values (say in God, the church, the state, our family, etc.), but in the existent's spontaneous act of choosing them. Each individual must positively assume his or her project (whether it be to write a novel, graduate from university, preside over a courtroom, etc.) and not try to escape freedom by escaping into the goal as into a static object. Thus, we act ethically only insofar as we accept the weight of our choices and the consequences and responsibilities of our fundamental, ontological freedom. As Beauvoir tells us, "to will oneself moral and to will oneself free are one and the same decision."

The genuine human being thus does not recognize any foreign absolute not consciously and actively chosen by the person him or herself. This idea is perhaps best seen in Beauvoir's critique of Hegel which runs throughout this text. Although Hegel is not the only philosopher with whom she is in dialogue (she addresses Kant, Marx, Descartes, and Sartre, as well) he represents the philosophical crystallization of the desire for human beings to escape their freedom by submerging it into an external absolute. Thus Hegel, for Beauvoir, sets up an "Absolute Subject" whose realization only comes at the end of history, thereby justifying the sacrifice of countless individuals in the relentless pursuit of its own perfection. As such, Hegel's Absolute represents an abstraction which is taken as the truth of existence which annihilates instead of preserves the individual human lives which compose it. Only a philosophy which values the freedom of each individual existent can alone be ethical. Philosophies such as those of Hegel, Kant, and Marx which privilege the universal are built upon the necessary diminution of the particular and as such, cannot be authentically ethical systems. Beauvoir claims against these philosophers of the absolute, that existentialism embraces the plurality of the concrete, particular human beings enmeshed in their own unique situations and engaged in their own projects.

However, Beauvoir is also emphatic that even though existentialist ethics upholds the sanctity of individuals, an individual is always situated within a community and as such, separate existents are necessarily bound to each other. She argues that every enterprise is expressed in a world populated by and thus affecting other human beings. She defends this position by returning to an idea touched upon in Pyrrhus et Cinéas and more fully developed in the Ethics, which is that individual projects fall in upon themselves if there are not others with whom our projects intersect and who consequently carry our actions beyond us in space and time.

In order to illustrate the complexity of situated freedom, Beauvoir provides us with an important element of growth, development and freedom in The Ethics of Ambiguity. Most philosophers begin their discussions with a fully-grown, rational human being, as if only the adult concerns philosophical inquiry. However, Beauvoir incorporates an analysis of childhood in which she argues that the will, or freedom, is developed over time. Thus, the child is not considered moral because he or she does not have a connection to a past or future and action can only be understood as unfolding over time. In addition, the situation of the child gives us a glimpse into what Beauvoir calls the attitude of seriousness in which values are given, not chosen. In fact, it is because each person was once a child that the serious attitude is the most prevalent form of bad faith.

Describing the various ways in which existents flee their freedom and responsibility, Beauvoir catalogues a number of different inauthentic attitudes, which in various forms are all indicative of a flight from freedom. As the child is neither moral nor immoral, the first actual category of bad faith consists of the "sub-man" who, through boredom and laziness, restrains the original movement of spontaneity in the denial of his or her freedom. This is a dangerous attitude in which to live because even as the sub-man rejects freedom, he or she becomes a useful pawn to be recruited by the "serious man" to enact brutal, immoral and violent action. The serious man is the most common attitude of flight as he or she embodies the desire that all existents share to found their freedom in an objective, external standard. The serious man upholds absolute and unconditioned values to which he or she subordinates his or her freedom. The object into which the serious attitude attempts to merge itself is not important-it can be the Military for the general, Fame for the actress, Power for the politician-what is important is that the self is lost into it. But as Beauvoir has already told us, all action loses meaning if it is not willed from freedom, setting up freedom as its goal. Thus the serious man is the ultimate example of bad faith because rather than seeking to embrace freedom, he or she seeks to lose into an external idol. All existents are tempted to set up values of seriousness (say, for example, by claiming that one is a "republican" or a "liberal" as if these monikers were substantial "things" that defined us in any essential sense) so as to give meaning to their lives. But the attitude of seriousness gives rise to tyranny and oppression when the "Cause" is pronounced more important than those who comprise it.

Other attitudes of bad faith include the "nihilist" which is an attitude resulting from disappointed seriousness turned back on itself. When the general understands that the military is a false idol that does not justify his existence, he may become a nihilist and deny that the world has any meaning at all. The nihilist desires to be nothing which is not unlike the reality of human freedom for Beauvoir. However, the nihilist is not an authentic choice because he or she does not assert nothingness in the sense of freedom, but in the sense of denial. Although mentioning other interesting attitudes of bad faith (such as the "demoniacal man" and the "passionate man") the last attitude of importance is the attitude of the "adventurer." The adventurer is interesting because it is so close to an authentically moral attitude. Disdaining the values of seriousness and nihilism, the adventurer throws him or herself into life and chooses action for its own sake. But the adventurer cares only for his or her own freedom and projects, and thus embodies a selfish and potentially tyrannical attitude. The adventurer demonstrates a tendency to align him or herself with whoever will bestow power, pleasure and glory. And often those who bestow such gifts, do not have the welfare of humanity as their main concern.

One of Beauvoir's greatest achievements in The Ethics of Ambiguity is found in her analyses of situation and mystification. For the early Sartre, one's situation (or facticity) is merely that which is to be transcended in the spontaneous surge of freedom. The situation is certainly a limit, but it is a limit-to-be-surpassed. Beauvoir, however, recognizes that some situations are such that they cannot be simply transcended but serve as strict and almost unsurpassable inhibitors to action. For example, she tells us that there are oppressed peoples such as slaves and many women who exist in a childlike world in which values, customs, gods, and laws are given to them without being freely chosen. Their situation is defined not by the possibility of transcendence, but by the enforcement of external institutions and power structures. Because of the power exerted upon them, their limitations cannot, in many circumstances, be transcended because they are not even known. Their situation, in other words, appears to be the natural order of the world. Thus the slave and the woman are mystified into believing that their lot is assigned to them by nature. As Beauvoir explains, because we cannot revolt against nature, the oppressor convinces the oppressed that their situation is what it is because they are naturally inferior or slavish. In this way, the oppressor mystifies the oppressed by keeping them ignorant of their freedom, thereby preventing them from revolting. Beauvoir rightly points out that one simply cannot claim that those who are mystified or oppressed are living in bad faith. We can only judge the actions of those individuals as emerging from their situation.

Only the authentically moral attitude understands that the freedom of the self requires the freedom of others. To act alone or without concern for others is not to be free. As Beauvoir explains, "No project can be defined except by its interference with other projects." Thus if my project intersects with others who are enslaved-either literally or through mystification-I too am not truly free. What is more, if I do not actively seek to help those who are not free, I am implicated in their oppression.

As this book was written after World War II, it is not so surprising that Beauvoir would be concerned with questions of oppression and liberation and the ethical responsibility that each of us has to each other. Clearly she finds the attitude of seriousness to be the leading culprit in nationalistic movements such as Nazism which manipulate people into believing in a Cause as an absolute and unquestionable command, demanding the sacrifice of countless individuals. Beauvoir pleads with us to remember that we can never prefer a Cause to a human being and that the end does not necessarily justify the means. In this sense, Beauvoir is able to promote an existential ethics which asserts the reality of individual projects and sacrifice while maintaining that such projects and sacrifices have meaning only in a community comprised of individuals with a past, present, and future.

3. Feminism

a. The Second Sex

Most philosophers agree that Beauvoir's greatest contribution to philosophy is her revolutionary magnum opus, The Second Sex. Published in two volumes in 1949 (condensed into one text divided into two "books" in English), this work immediately found both an eager audience and harsh critics. The Second Sex was so controversial that the Vatican put it (along with her novel, The Mandarins) on the Index of prohibited books. At the time The Second Sex was written, very little serious philosophy on women from a feminist perspective had been done. With the exception of a handful of books, systematic treatments of the oppression of women both historically and in the modern age were almost unheard of. Striking for the breadth of research and the profundity of its central insights, The Second Sex remains to this day one of the foundational texts in philosophy, feminism, and women's studies.

The main thesis of The Second Sex revolves around the idea that woman has been held in a relationship of long-standing oppression to man through her relegation to being man's "Other." In agreement with Hegelian and Sartrean philosophy, Beauvoir finds that the self needs otherness in order to define itself as a subject; the category of the otherness, therefore, is necessary in the constitution of the self as a self. However, the movement of self-understanding through alterity is supposed to be reciprocal in that the self is often just as much objectified by its other as the self objectifies it. What Beauvoir discovers in her multifaceted investigation into woman's situation, is that woman is consistently defined as the Other by man who takes on the role of the Self. As Beauvoir explains in her Introduction, woman "is the incidental, the inessential, as opposed to the essential. He is the Subject, he is the Absolute-she is the Other." In addition, Beauvoir maintains that human existence is an ambiguous interplay between transcendence and immanence, yet men have been privileged with expressing transcendence through projects, whereas women have been forced into the repetitive and uncreative life of immanence. Beauvoir thus proposes to investigate how this radically unequal relationship emerged as well as what structures, attitudes and presuppositions continue to maintain its social power.

The work is divided into two major themes. The first book investigates the "Facts and Myths" about women from multiple perspectives including the biological-scientific, psychoanalytic, materialistic, historical, literary and anthropological. In each of these treatments, Beauvoir is careful to claim that none of them is sufficient to explain woman's definition as man's Other or her consequent oppression. However, each of them contributes to woman's overall situation as the Other sex. For example, in her discussion of biology and history, she notes the women experience certain phenomena such as pregnancy, lactation, and menstruation that are foreign to men's experience and thus contribute to a marked difference in women's situation. However, these physiological occurrences in no way directly cause woman to be man's subordinate because biology and history are not mere "facts" of an unbiased observer, but are always incorporated into and interpreted from a situation. In addition, she acknowledges that psychoanalysis and historical materialism contribute tremendous insights into the sexual, familial and material life of woman, but fail to account for the whole picture. In the case of psychoanalysis, it denies the reality of choice and in the case of historical materialism, it neglects to take into account the existential importance of the phenomena it reduces to material conditions.

The most philosophically rich discussion of Book I comes in Beauvoir's analysis of myths. There she tackles the way in which the preceding analyses (biological, historical, psychoanalytic, etc.) contribute to the formulation of the myth of the "Eternal Feminine." This paradigmatic myth, which incorporates multiple myths of woman under it (such as the myth of the mother, the virgin, the motherland, nature, etc.) attempts to trap woman into an impossible ideal by denying the individuality and situation of all different kinds of women. In fact, the ideal set by the Eternal Feminine sets up an impossible expectation because the various manifestations of the myth of femininity appear as contradictory and doubled. For example, history shows us that for as many representations of the mother as the respected guardian of life, there are as many depictions of her as the hated harbinger of death. The contradiction that man feels at having been born and having to die gets projected onto the mother who takes the blame for both. Thus woman as mother is both hated and loved and individual mothers are hopelessly caught in the contradiction. This doubled and contradictory operation appears in all feminine myths, thus forcing women to unfairly take the burden and blame for existence.

Book II begins with Beauvoir's most famous assertion, "One is not born, but rather becomes, a woman." By this, Beauvoir means to destroy the essentialism which claims that women are born "feminine" (according to whatever the culture and time define it to be) but are rather constructed to be such through social indoctrination. Using a wide array of accounts and observations, the first section of Book II traces the education of woman from her childhood, through her adolescence and finally to her experiences of lesbianism and sexual initiation (if she has any). At each stage, Beauvoir illustrates how women are forced to relinquish their claims to transcendence and authentic subjectivity by a progressively more stringent acceptance of the "passive" and "alienated" role to man's "active" and "subjective" demands. Woman's passivity and alienation are then explored in what Beauvoir entitles her "Situation" and her "Justifications." Beauvoir studies the roles of wife, mother, and prostitute to show how women, instead of transcending through work and creativity, are forced into monotonous existences of having children, tending house and being the sexual receptacles of the male libido.

Because she maintains the existentialist belief in the absolute ontological freedom of each existent regardless of sex, Beauvoir never claims that man has succeeded in destroying woman's freedom or in actually turning her into an "object" in relation to his subjectivity. She remains a transcendent freedom despite her objectification, alienation and oppression.

Although we certainly can not claim that woman's role as the Other is her fault, we also cannot say that she is always entirely innocent in her subjection. As taken up in the discussion of The Ethics of Ambiguity, Beauvoir believes that there are many possible attitudes of bad faith where the existent flees his or her responsibility into prefabricated values and beliefs. Many women living in a patriarchal culture are guilty of the same action and thus are in some ways complicitous in their own subjugation because of the seeming benefits it can bring as well as the respite from responsibility it promises. Beauvoir discusses three particular inauthentic attitudes in which women hide their freedom in: "The Narcissist," "The Woman in Love," and "The Mystic." In all three of these attitudes, women deny the original thrust of their freedom by submerging it into the object; in the case of the first, the object is herself, the second, her beloved and the third, the absolute or God.

Beauvoir concludes her work by asserting various concrete demands necessary for woman's emancipation and the reclamation of her selfhood. First and foremost, she demands that woman be allowed to transcend through her own free projects with all the danger, risk, and uncertainty that entails. As such, modern woman "prides herself on thinking, taking action, working, creating, on the same terms as men; instead of seeking to disparage them, she declares herself their equal." In order to ensure woman's equality, Beauvoir advocates such changes in social structures such as universal childcare, equal education, contraception, and legal abortion for women-and perhaps most importantly, woman's economic freedom and independence from man. In order to achieve this kind of independence, Beauvoir believes that women will benefit from non-alienating, non-exploitative productive labor to some degree. In other words, Beauvoir believes that women will benefit tremendously from work. As far as marriage is concerned, the nuclear family is damaging to both partners, especially the woman. Marriage, like any other authentic choice, must be chosen actively and at all times or else it is a flight from freedom into a static institution.

Beauvoir's emphasis on the fact that women need access to the same kinds of activities and projects as men places her to some extent in the tradition of liberal, or second-wave feminism. She demands that women be treated as equal to men and laws, customs and education must be altered to encourage this. However, The Second Sex always maintains its fundamental existentialist belief that each individual, regardless of sex, class or age, should be encouraged to define him or herself and to take on the individual responsibility that comes with freedom. This requires not just focusing on universal institutions, but on the situated individual existent struggling within the ambiguity of existence.

4. Literature

a. Novels

In her autobiographies, Beauvoir often makes the claim that although her passion for philosophy was lifelong, her heart was always set on becoming an author of great literature. What she succeeded in doing was writing some of the best existentialist literature of the 20th century. Much as Camus and Sartre discovered, existentialism's concern for the individual thrown into an absurd world and forced to act, lends itself well to the artistic medium of fiction. All of Beauvoir's novels incorporate existential themes, problems, and questions in her attempt to describe the human situation in times of personal turmoil, political upheaval, and social unrest.

Her first novel, L'Invitée (She Came to Stay) was published in 1943. Opening with a quote from Hegel about the desire of self-consciousness to seek the death of the other, the book is a complex psychological study of the battles waged for selfhood. Set during the buildup to World War II, it charts the complexity of war in individual relationships. The protagonist, Françoise is forced to undergo the realization that she is not the center of the world and that her relationship to her lover, Pierre is not guaranteed but must, like all relationships, be constantly chosen and won. This work brought her recognition and lead to the writing of one of her most critically acclaimed novels, Le Sang des Autres (The Blood of Others) in 1945. This work begins to take into account the social responsibility that one's times demand. Set during the German Occupation of France, it follows the lives of the Patriot leader, Jean Blomart and his agony over sending his lover to her death. This work was heralded as one of the leading existential novels of the Resistance and stands as a testimony to the often tragic contradiction between the responsibility we have to ourselves, to those we love, and to our people and humanity as a whole.

In 1946, Beauvoir published Tous les Hommes sont Mortels (All Men are Mortal) which revolves around the question of mortality and immortality. When an aspiring actress discovers that a mysterious and morose man is immortal, she becomes obsessed with her own immortality which she believes will be carried forth by him into eternity after her death. Although this work was not as well-received by critics and the public, it is especially provocative with the phenomena of time and mortality and the desire all human beings share to achieve immortality in any form we can, and how this leads to a denial of lived experience in the here and now.

Les Mandarins (The Mandarins), Beauvoir's most famous and critically acclaimed novel was published in 1954 and soon thereafter won the prestigious French award for literature, the Prix Goncourt. This work is a profound study of the responsibilities that the intellectual has to his or her society. It explores the virtues and pitfalls of philosophy, journalism, theater, and literature as these media try to speak to their age and to implement social change. The Mandarins brings in a number of Beauvoir's own personal concerns as it tarries with the issues of Communism and Socialism, the fears of American imperialism and the nuclear bomb, and the relationship of the individual intellectual to other individuals and to society. It also raises the questions of personal and political allegiance and how the two often conflict with tragic results. Finally, Beauvoir's novel, Les Belles Images (1966), explores the constellation of relationships, hypocrisy and social mores in Parisian society.

b. Short Stories

Beauvoir wrote two collections of short stories. The first, Quand Prime le Spirituel (When Things of the Spirit Come First) wasn't published until 1979 even though it was her first work of fiction submitted (and rejected) for publication (in 1937). As the 1930's were less amenable to both women writers and stories on women, it is not so peculiar that this collection was rejected only to be rediscovered and esteemed over forty years later. This work offers fascinating insight into Beauvoir's concerns with women and their unique attitudes and situations long before the writing of The Second Sex. Divided into five chapters, each titled by the name of the main female character, it exposes the hypocrisy of the French upper classes who hide their self-interests behind a veil of intellectual or religious absolutes. The stories take up the issues of the crushing demands of religious piety and individual renunciation, the tendency to aggrandize our lives to others and the crisis of identity when we are forced to confront our deceptions, and the difficulty of being a woman submitted to bourgeois and religious education and expectations. Beauvoir's second collection of short stories, La Femme Rompue (The Woman Destroyed), was published in 1967 and was considerably well-received. This too offers separate studies of three women, each of whom is living in bad faith in one form or another. As each encounters a crisis in her familial relationships, she engages in a flight from her responsibility and freedom. This collection expands upon themes found in her ethics and feminism of the often denied complicity in one's own undoing.

c. Theater

Beauvoir only wrote one play, Les Bouches Inutiles (Who Shall Die?) which was performed in 1945-the same year of the founding of Les Temps Modernes. Clearly enmeshed in the issues of World War II Europe, the dilemma of this play focuses on who is worth sacrificing for the benefit of the collective. This piece was influenced by the history of 14th century Italian towns that, when under siege and facing mass starvation, threw out the old, sick, weak, women and children to fend for themselves so that there might be enough for the strong men to hold out a little longer. The play is set in just such circumstances which were hauntingly resonant to Nazi occupied France. True to Beauvoir's ethical commitments which assert the freedom and sanctity of the individual only within the freedom and respect of his or her community, the town decides to rise up together and either defeat the enemy or to die together. Although the play contains a number of important and well-developed existential, ethical and feminist themes, it was not as successful as her other literary expressions. Although she never again wrote for the theater, many of the characters of her novels (for example in She Came to Stay, All Men are Mortal, and The Mandarins) are playwrights and actors, showing her confidence in the theatrical arts to convey crucial existential and socio-political dilemmas.

5. Cultural Studies

a. Travel Observations

Beauvoir was always passionate about traveling and embarked upon many adventures both alone and with Sartre and others. Two trips had a tremendous impact upon her and were the impetus for two major books. The first, L'Amérique au Jour le Jour (America Day by Day) was published in 1948, the year after her lecture tour of the United States in 1947. During this visit, she spent time with Richard and Ellen Wright, met Nelson Algren, and visited numerous American cities such as New York, Chicago, Hollywood, Las Vegas, New Orleans and San Antonio. During her stay, she was commissioned by the New York Times to write an article entitled, "An Existentialist Looks at Americans," appearing on May 25, 1947. It offers a penetrating critique of the United States as a country so full of promise but also one that is a slave to novelty, material culture, and a pathological fixation on the present at the expense of the past. Such themes are repeated in greater detail in America Day by Day, which also tackles the issue of America's strained race relations, imperialism, anti-intellectualism, and class tensions.

The second major work to come out of Beauvoir's travels resulted from her two-month trip to China with Sartre in 1955. Published in 1957, La Longue Marche (The Long March) is a generally positive account of the vast Communist country. Although disturbed by the censorship and careful choreographing of their visit by the Communists, she found China to be working towards a betterment in the life of its people. The themes of labor and the plight of the worker are common throughout this work, as is the situation of women and the family. Despite the breadth of its investigation and the desire on Beauvoir's behalf to study a completely foreign culture, it was both a critical and a personal embarrassment. She later admitted that it was done more to make money than to offer a serious cultural analysis of China and its people. Regardless of these somewhat justified criticisms, it stands as interesting exploration of the tension between capitalism and Communism, the self and its other, and what it means to be free in different cultural contexts.

b. The Coming of Age

In 1967, Beauvoir began a monumental study of the same genre and caliber as The Second Sex. La Vieillesse (The Coming of Age, 1970) met with instant critical success. The Second Sex had been received with considerable hostility from many groups who did not want to be confronted with an unpleasant critique of their sexist and oppressive attitudes towards women; The Coming of Age however, was generally welcomed although it too critiques society's prejudices towards another oppressed group: the elderly. This masterful work takes the fear of age as a cultural phenomenon and seeks to give voice to a silenced and detested class of human beings. Lashing out against the injustices suffered by the old, Beauvoir successfully complicates a problem all too oversimplified. For example, she notes that, depending on one's work or class, old age can come earlier or later. Those who are materially more advantaged can afford good medicine, food and exercise, and thus live much longer and age less quickly, than a miner who is old at 50. In addition, she notices the philosophically complex connection between age and poverty and age and dehumanization.

As she had done in with The Second Sex, Beauvoir approaches the subject matter of The Coming of Age from a variety of perspectives including the biological, anthropological, historical, and sociological. In addition, she explores the question of age from the perspective of the living, elderly human being in relation to his or her body, time and the external world. Just as with The Second Sex, this later work is divided into two books, the first which deals with "Old Age as Seen from Without" and the second with, "Being-in-the-World." Beauvoir explains the motivation for this division in her Introduction where she writes, "Every human situation can be viewed from without-seen from the point of view of an outsider-or from within, in so far as the subject assumes and at the same time transcends it." Continuing to uphold her belief in the fundamental ambiguity of existence which always sits atop the contradiction of immanence and transcendence, objectivity and subjectivity, Beauvoir treats the subject of age both as an object of cultural-historical knowledge and as the first-hand, lived experience of aged individuals.

What she concludes from her investigation into the experience, fear and stigma of old age is that even though the process of aging and the decline into death is an inescapable, existential phenomenon for those human beings who live long enough to experience it, there is no necessity to our loathing the aged members of society. There is a certain acceptance of the fear of age felt by most people because it ironically stands as more of the opposite to life than does death. However, this does not demand that the aged merely resign themselves to waiting for death or for younger members of society to treat them as the invisible class. Rather, Beauvoir argues in true existentialist fashion that old age must still be a time of creative and meaningful projects and relationships with others. This means that above all else, old age must not be a time of boredom, but a time of continuous political and social action. This requires a change of orientation among the aged themselves and within society as a whole which must transform its idea that a person is only valuable insofar as they are profitable. Instead, both individuals and society must recognize that a person's value lies in his or her humanity which is unaffected by age.

c. Autobiographical Works

In her autobiography, Beauvoir tells us that in wanting to write about herself she had to first explain what it meant to be a woman and that this realization was the genesis of The Second Sex. However, Beauvoir also successfully embarked upon the recounting of her life in four volumes of detailed and philosophically rich autobiography. In addition to painting a vibrant picture of her own life, Beauvoir also gives us access into other influential figures of the 20th century ranging from Camus, Sartre and Merleau-Ponty, to Richard Wright, Jean Cocteau, Jean Genet, Antonin Artaud and Fidel Castro among many others. Even though her autobiography covers both non-philosophical and philosophical ground, it is important not to downplay the role that autobiography has in Beauvoir's theoretical development. Indeed, many other existentialists, such as Nietzsche, Sartre, and Kierkegaard, embrace the autobiographical as a key component to the philosophical. Beauvoir always maintained the importance of the individual's situation and experience in the face of contingency and the ambiguity of existence. Through the recounting of her life, we are given a unique and personal picture of Beauvoir's struggles as a philosopher, social reformer, writer and woman during a time of great cultural and artistic achievement and political upheaval.

The first volume of her autobiography, Mémoirs d'une Jeune Fille Rangée (Memoirs of a Dutiful Daughter, 1958), traces Beauvoir's childhood, her relationship with her parents, her profound friendship with Zaza and her schooling up through her years at the Sorbonne. In this volume, Beauvoir shows the development of her intellectual and independent personality and the influences which lead to her decisions to become a philosopher and a writer. It also presents a picture of a woman who was critical of her class and its expectations of women from an early age. The second volume of her autobiography, La Force de l'Âge (The Prime of Life, 1960) is often considered to be the richest of all the volumes. Like Memoirs of a Dutiful Daughter, it was commercially and critically well received. Taking up the years from 1929-1944, Beauvoir portrays her transition from student to adult and the discovery of personal responsibility in war and peace. In many points, she explores the motivations for many of her works, such as The Second Sex and The Mandarins. The third installment of her autobiography, La Force des Choses (The Force of Circumstance, 1963; published in two separate volumes) takes up the time frame following the conclusion of World War II in1944 to the year 1962. In these volumes, Beauvoir becomes increasingly more aware of the political responsibility of the intellectual to his or her country and times. In the volume between 1944-1952 (After the War) Beauvoir describes the intellectual blossoming of post-war Paris, rich with anecdotes on writers, filmmakers and artists. The volume focusing on the decade between 1952-1962 (Hard Times), shows a much more subdued and somewhat cynical Beauvoir who is coming to terms with fame, age and the political atrocities waged by France in its war with Algeria (taken up in her work with Gisèle Halimi and the case of Djamila Boupacha). Because of its brutal honesty on the themes of aging, death and war, this volume of her autobiography was less well-received than the previous two. The final installment in the chronicling of her life charts the years from 1962-1972. Tout Compte Fait, (All Said and Done, 1972) shows an older and wiser philosopher and feminist who looks back over her life, her relationships, and her accomplishments and recognizes that it was all for the best. Here Beauvoir shows her commitments to feminism and social change in a clarity only hinted at in earlier volumes and she continues to struggle with the virtues and pitfalls of capitalism and Communism. Additionally, she returns to past works such as The Second Sex, to reevaluate her motivations and her conclusions about literature, philosophy, and the act of remembering. She again returns to the themes of death and dying and their existential significance as she begins to experience the passing of those she loves.

Although not exactly considered to be "autobiography," it is worth mentioning two more facets of Beauvoir's self-revelatory literature. The first consists of her works on the lives and deaths of loved ones. In this area, we find her sensitive and personal recounting of her mother's death in Une Mort très Douce (A Very Easy Death, 1964). This book is often considered to be one of Beauvoir's best in its day-by-day portrayal of the ambiguity of love and the experience of loss. In 1981, following the death of Sartre the previous year, she published La Cérémonie des Adieux (Adieux: A Farewell to Sartre) which recounts the progression of an aged and infirm Sartre to his death. This work was somewhat controversial as many readers missed its qualities as a tribute to the late, great philosopher and instead considered it to be an inappropriate exposé on his illness.

The second facet of Beauvoir's life that can be considered autobiographical are the publication by Beauvoir of Sartre's letters to her in Lettres au Castor et à Quelques Autres (Letters to Castor and Others, 1983) and of her own correspondence with Sartre in Letters to Sartre published after her death in 1990. Finally, A Transatlantic Love Affair, compiled by Sylvie le Bon de Beauvoir in 1997 and published in 1998, presents Beauvoir's letters (originally written in English) to Nelson Algren. Each of these works provides us with another perspective into the life of one of the most powerful philosophers of the 20th century and one of the most influential female intellectuals on the history of Western thinking.

6. References and Further Reading

a. Selected Works by Beauvoir (in French and English)

  • Beauvoir, Simone de. Adieux: A Farewell to Sartre. Translated by Patrick O'Brian. Harmondsworth: Penguin, 1986. English translation of La cérémonie des adieux (Paris: Gallimard, 1981).
  • Beauvoir, Simone de. All Men are Mortal. Translated by Leonard M. Friedman. New York: W. W. Norton & Co., 1992. English translation of Tous les Hommes sont Mortels (Paris: Gallimard, 1946).
  • Beauvoir, Simone de. All Said and Done. Translated by Patrick O'Brian. New York: Paragon House, 1993. English translation of Tout compte fait (Paris: Gallimard, 1972).
  • Beauvoir, Simone de. America Day by Day. Translated by Carol Cosman. Berkeley: University of California Press, 1990. English translation of L'Amérique au jour le jour (Paris: Gallimard, 1954).
  • Beauvoir, Simone de. Sons & Co. Ltd., 1968. English translation of Les belles images (Paris: Gallimard, 1966).
  • Beauvoir, Simone de. The Blood of Others. Translated by Roger Senhouse and Yvonne Moyse. New York: Pantheon Books, 1948. English translation of Le sang des autres (Paris: Gallimard, 1945).
  • Beauvoir, Simone de. The Coming of Age. Translated by Patrick O'Brian. New York: W. W. Norton & Company, 1996. English translation of La vieillesse (Paris: Gallimard, 1970).
  • Beauvoir, Simone de. "In Defense of Djamila Boupacha." Le Monde, 3 June, 1960. Appendix B in Djamila Boupacha: The Story of the Torture of a Young Algerian Girl which Shocked Liberal French Opinion; Introduction to Djamila Boupacha. Edited by Simone de Beauvoir and Gisèle Halimi. Translated by Peter Green. New York: The Macmillan Company, 1962. English translations of Djamila Boupacha (Paris: Gallimard, 1962).
  • Beauvoir, Simone de. The Ethics of Ambiguity. Translated by Bernard Frechtman. New York: Citadel Press, 1996. English translation of Pour une morale de l'ambiguïté (Paris: Gallimard, 1947). Beauvoir, Simone de Beauvoir, Simone de. Force of Circumstance, Vol. I: After the War, 1944-1952; Vol. 2: Hard Times, 1952-1962. Translated by Richard Howard. New York: Paragon House, 1992. English translation of La force des choses (Paris: Gallimard, 1963).
  • Beauvoir, Simone de. Letters to Sartre. Translated and Edited by Quintin Hoare. London: Vintage, 1992. English translation of Lettres à Sartre (Paris: Gallimard, 1990).
  • Beauvoir, Simone de. The Long March. Translated by Austryn Wainhouse. New York: The World Publishing, 1958. English translation of La longue marche (Paris: Gallimard, 1957).
  • Beauvoir, Simone de. The Mandarins. Translated by Leonard M. Friedman. New York: W. W. Norton & Co., 1991. English translation of Les mandarins (Paris: Gallimard, 1954).
  • Beauvoir, Simone de. Memoirs of a Dutiful Daughter. Translated by James Kirkup. Middlesex: Penguin Books, 1963. English translation of Mémoires d'une jeune fille rangée (Paris: Gallimard, 1958).
  • Beauvoir, Simone de. The Prime of Life. Translated by Peter Green. New York: Lancer Books, 1966. English translation of La force de l'âge (Paris: Gallimard, 1960).
  • Beauvoir, Simone de. Pyrrhus et Cinéas. Paris: Gallimard, 1944.
  • Beauvoir, Simone de. The Second Sex. Translated by H. M. Parshley. New York: Vintage Books, 1989. English translation of Le deuxième sexe (Paris: Gallimard, 1949).
  • Beauvoir, Simone de. Must We Burn Sade? Translated by Annette Michelson, The Marquis de Sade. New York: Grove Press, 1966. English translation of Faut-il brûler Sade? (Paris: Gallimard, 1955).
  • Beauvoir, Simone de. She Came to Stay. Translated by Roger Senhouse and Yvonne Moyse. New York: W. W. Norton & Co.,1954. English translation of L'Invitée (Paris: Gallimard, 1943).
  • Beauvoir, Simone de. A Transatlantic Love Affair: Letters to Nelson Algren. Compiled and annotated by Sylvie le Bon de Beauvoir. New York: The New Press, 1998.
  • Beauvoir, Simone de. A Very Easy Death. Translated by Patrick O'Brian. New York: Pantheon Books, 1965. English translation of Une mort très douce (Paris: Gallimard, 1964).
  • Beauvoir, Simone de. When Things of the Spirit Come First. Translated by Patrick O'Brian. New York: Pantheon Books, 1982. English translation of Quand prime le spirituel (Paris: Gallimard, 1979).
  • Beauvoir, Simone de. Who Shall Die? Translated by Claude Francis and Fernande Gontier. Florissant: River Press, 1983. English translation of Les bouches inutiles (Paris: Gallimard, 1945).
  • Beauvoir, Simone de. The Woman Destroyed. Translated by Patrick O'Brian. New York: Pantheon Books, 1969. English translation of La femme rompue (Paris: Gallimard, 1967).

b. Selected Books on Beauvoir in English

  • Arp, Kristana. The Bonds of Freedom. Chicago: Open Court Publishing, 2001.
  • Bair, Deirdre. Simone de Beauvoir: A Biography. New York: Summit Books, 1990.
  • Bauer, Nancy. Simone de Beauvoir, Philosophy and Feminism. New York: Columbia University Press, 2001.
  • Bergoffen, Debra. The Philosophy of Simone de Beauvoir: Gendered Phenomenologies, Erotic Generosities. Albany: SUNY Press, 1997.
  • Fallaize, Elizabeth. The Novels of Simone de Beauvoir. London: Routledge, 1988.
  • Fullbrook, Kate and Edward. Simone de Beauvoir and Jean-Paul Sartre: The Remaking of a Twentieth-Century Legend. New York: Basic Books: 1994.
  • Le Doeuff, Michèle. Hipparchia's Choice: An Essay Concerning Women, Philosophy, Etc. Translated by Trista Selous. Oxford: Blackwell Publishers, 1991.
  • Lundgren-Gothlin, Eva. Sex and Existence: Simone de Beauvoir's 'The Second Sex.' Translated by Linda Schenck. Hanover: Wesleyan University Press, 1996.
  • Moi, Toril. Feminist Theory and Simone de Beauvoir. Oxford: Blackwell, 1990.
  • Moi, Toril. Simone de Beauvoir: The Making of an Intellectual Woman. Oxford: Blackwell, 1994.
  • Okely, Judith. Simone de Beauvoir. New York: Pantheon Books, 1986.
  • Scholz, Sally J. On de Beauvoir. Belmont: Wadsworth, 2000.
  • Schwarzer, Alice. After the Second Sex: Conversations with Simone de Beauvoir. Translated by Marianne Howarth. New York: Pantheon Books, 1984.
  • Simons, Margaret. Beauvoir and the Second Sex: Feminism, Race and the Origins of Existentialism. Lanham: Rowman and Littlefield, 1999.
  • Simons, Margaret. ed. Feminist Interpretations of Simone de Beauvoir. University Park: The Pennsylvania State University Press, 1995.
  • Vintges, Karen. Philosophy as Passion: The Thinking of Simone de Beauvoir. Translated by Anne Lavelle. Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1996.

Author Information

Shannon Mussett
Utah Valley University
U. S. A.

Jacques Derrida (1930—2004)

Jacques Derrida was one of the most well known twentieth century philosophers. He was also one of the most prolific. Distancing himself from the various philosophical movements and traditions that preceded him on the French intellectual scene (phenomenology, existentialism, and structuralism), he developed a strategy called "deconstruction" in the mid 1960s. Although not purely negative, deconstruction is primarily concerned with something tantamount to a critique of the Western philosophical tradition. Deconstruction is generally presented via an analysis of specific texts. It seeks to expose, and then to subvert, the various binary oppositions that undergird our dominant ways of thinking—presence/absence, speech/writing, and so forth.

Deconstruction has at least two aspects: literary and philosophical. The literary aspect concerns the textual interpretation, where invention is essential to finding hidden alternative meanings in the text. The philosophical aspect concerns the main target of deconstruction: the “metaphysics of presence,” or simply metaphysics. Starting from an Heideggerian point of view, Derrida argues that metaphysics affects the whole of philosophy from Plato onwards. Metaphysics creates dualistic oppositions and installs a hierarchy that unfortunately privileges one term of each dichotomy (presence before absence, speech before writing, and so on).

The deconstructive strategy is to unmask these too-sedimented ways of thinking, and it operates on them especially through two steps—reversing dichotomies and attempting to corrupt the dichotomies themselves. The strategy also aims to show that there are undecidables, that is, something that cannot conform to either side of a dichotomy or opposition. Undecidability returns in later period of Derrida’s reflection, when it is applied to reveal paradoxes involved in notions such as gift giving or hospitality, whose conditions of possibility are at the same time their conditions of impossibility. Because of this, it is undecidable whether authentic giving or hospitality are either possible or impossible.

In this period, the founder of deconstruction turns his attention to ethical themes. In particular, the theme of responsibility to the other (for example, God or a beloved person) leads Derrida to leave the idea that responsibility is associated with a behavior publicly and rationally justifiable by general principles. Reflecting upon tales of Jewish tradition, he highlights the absolute singularity of responsibility to the other.

Deconstruction has had an enormous influence in psychology, literary theory, cultural studies, linguistics, feminism, sociology and anthropology. Poised in the interstices between philosophy and non-philosophy (or philosophy and literature), it is not difficult to see why this is the case. What follows in this article, however, is an attempt to bring out the philosophical significance of Derrida’s thought.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Works
  2. Deconstructive Strategy
    1. Metaphysics of Presence/Logocentrism
  3. Key terms from the early work
    1. Speech/Writing
    2. Arche-writing
    3. Différance
    4. Trace
    5. Supplement
  4. Time and Phenomenology
  5. Undecidability
    1. Decision
  6. The Other
    1. Responsibility to the Other
    2. Wholly Other/Messianic
  7. Possible and Impossible Aporias
    1. The Gift
    2. Hospitality
    3. Forgiveness
    4. Mourning
  8. References and Further Reading
    1. Derrida's Texts (and Their Abbreviations)
    2. Selected Commentaries

1. Life and Works

In 1930, Derrida was born into a Jewish family in Algiers. He was also born into an environment of some discrimination. In fact, he either withdrew from, or was forced out of at least two schools during his childhood simply on account of being Jewish. He was expelled from one school because there was a 7% limit on the Jewish population, and he later withdrew from another school on account of the anti-semitism. While Derrida would resist any reductive understanding of his work based upon his biographical life, it could be argued that these kind of experiences played a large role in his insistence upon the importance of the marginal, and the other, in his later thought.

Derrida was twice refused a position in the prestigious Ecole Normale Superieure (where Sartre, Simone de Beauvoir and the majority of French intellectuals and academics began their careers), but he was eventually accepted to the institution at the age of 19. He hence moved from Algiers to France, and soon after he also began to play a major role in the leftist journal Tel Quel. Derrida's initial work in philosophy was largely phenomenological, and his early training as a philosopher was done largely through the lens of Husserl. Other important inspirations on his early thought include Nietzsche, Heidegger, Saussure, Levinas and Freud. Derrida acknowledges his indebtedness to all of these thinkers in the development of his approach to texts, which has come to be known as 'deconstruction'.

It was in 1967 that Derrida really arrived as a philosopher of world importance. He published three momentous texts (Of Grammatology, Writing and Difference, and Speech and Phenomena). All of these works have been influential for different reasons, but it is Of Grammatology that remains his most famous work (it is analysed in some detail in this article). In Of Grammatology, Derrida reveals and then undermines the speech-writing opposition that he argues has been such an influential factor in Western thought. His preoccupation with language in this text is typical of much of his early work, and since the publication of these and other major texts (including Dissemination, Glas, The Postcard, Spectres of Marx, The Gift of Death, and Politics of Friendship), deconstruction has gradually moved from occupying a major role in continental Europe, to also becoming a significant player in the Anglo-American philosophical context. This is particularly so in the areas of literary criticism, and cultural studies, where deconstruction's method of textual analysis has inspired theorists like Paul de Man. He has also had lecturing positions at various universities, the world over. Derrida died in 2004.

Deconstruction has frequently been the subject of some controversy. When Derrida was awarded an honorary doctorate at Cambridge in 1992, there were howls of protest from many 'analytic' philosophers. Since then, Derrida has also had many dialogues with philosophers like John Searle (see Limited Inc.), in which deconstruction has been roundly criticised, although perhaps unfairly at times. However, what is clear from the antipathy of such thinkers is that deconstruction challenges traditional philosophy in several important ways, and the remainder of this article will highlight why this is so.

2. Deconstructive Strategy

Derrida, like many other contemporary European theorists, is preoccupied with undermining the oppositional tendencies that have befallen much of the Western philosophical tradition. In fact, dualisms are the staple diet of deconstruction, for without these hierarchies and orders of subordination it would be left with nowhere to intervene. Deconstruction is parasitic in that rather than espousing yet another grand narrative, or theory about the nature of the world in which we partake, it restricts itself to distorting already existing narratives, and to revealing the dualistic hierarchies they conceal. While Derrida's claims to being someone who speaks solely in the margins of philosophy can be contested, it is important to take these claims into account. Deconstruction is, somewhat infamously, the philosophy that says nothing. To the extent that it can be suggested that Derrida's concerns are often philosophical, they are clearly not phenomenological (he assures us that his work is to be read specifically against Husserl, Sartre and Merleau-Ponty) and nor are they ontological.

Deconstruction, and particularly early deconstruction, functions by engaging in sustained analyses of particular texts. It is committed to the rigorous analysis of the literal meaning of a text, and yet also to finding within that meaning, perhaps in the neglected corners of the text (including the footnotes), internal problems that actually point towards alternative meanings. Deconstruction must hence establish a methodology that pays close attention to these apparently contradictory imperatives (sameness and difference) and a reading of any Derridean text can only reaffirm this dual aspect. Derrida speaks of the first aspect of this deconstructive strategy as being akin to a fidelity and a "desire to be faithful to the themes and audacities of a thinking" (WD 84). At the same time, however, deconstruction also famously borrows from Martin Heidegger's conception of a 'destructive retrieve' and seeks to open texts up to alternative and usually repressed meanings that reside at least partly outside of the metaphysical tradition (although always also partly betrothed to it). This more violent and transgressive aspect of deconstruction is illustrated by Derrida's consistent exhortation to "invent in your own language if you can or want to hear mine; invent if you can or want to give my language to be understood" (MO 57). In suggesting that a faithful interpretation of him is one that goes beyond him, Derrida installs invention as a vitally important aspect of any deconstructive reading. He is prone to making enigmatic suggestions like "go there where you cannot go, to the impossible, it is indeed the only way of coming or going" (ON 75), and ultimately, the merit of a deconstructive reading consists in this creative contact with another text that cannot be characterised as either mere fidelity or as an absolute transgression, but rather which oscillates between these dual demands. The intriguing thing about deconstruction, however, is that despite the fact that Derrida's own interpretations of specific texts are quite radical, it is often difficult to pinpoint where the explanatory exegesis of a text ends and where the more violent aspect of deconstruction begins. Derrida is always reluctant to impose 'my text', ‘your text’ designations too conspicuously in his texts. This is partly because it is even problematic to speak of a 'work' of deconstruction, since deconstruction only highlights what was already revealed in the text itself. All of the elements of a deconstructive intervention reside in the "neglected cornerstones" of an already existing system (MDM 72), and this equation is not altered in any significant way whether that 'system' be conceived of as metaphysics generally, which must contain its non-metaphysical track, or the writings of a specific thinker, which must also always testify to that which they are attempting to exclude (MDM 73).

These are, of course, themes reflected upon at length by Derrida, and they have an immediate consequence on the meta-theoretical level. To the minimal extent that we can refer to Derrida's own arguments, it must be recognised that they are always intertwined with the arguments of whomever, or whatever, he seeks to deconstruct. For example, Derrida argues that his critique of the Husserlian 'now' moment is actually based upon resources within Husserl’s own text which elide the self-presence that he was attempting to secure (SP 64-66). If Derrida's point is simply that Husserl’s phenomenology holds within itself conclusions that Husserl failed to recognise, Derrida seems to be able to disavow any transcendental or ontological position. This is why he argues that his work occupies a place in the margins of philosophy, rather than simply being philosophy per se.

Deconstruction contends that in any text, there are inevitably points of equivocation and 'undecidability' that betray any stable meaning that an author might seek to impose upon his or her text. The process of writing always reveals that which has been suppressed, covers over that which has been disclosed, and more generally breaches the very oppositions that are thought to sustain it. This is why Derrida's 'philosophy’ is so textually based and it is also why his key terms are always changing, because depending upon who or what he is seeking to deconstruct, that point of equivocation will always be located in a different place.

This also ensures that any attempt to describe what deconstruction is, must be careful. Nothing would be more antithetical to deconstruction's stated intent than this attempt at defining it through the decidedly metaphysical question "what is deconstruction?" There is a paradoxicality involved in trying to restrict deconstruction to one particular and overarching purpose (OG 19) when it is predicated upon the desire to expose us to that which is wholly other (tout autre) and to open us up to alternative possibilities. At times, this exegesis will run the risk of ignoring the many meanings of Derridean deconstruction, and the widely acknowledged difference between Derrida's early and late work is merely the most obvious example of the difficulties involved in suggesting "deconstruction says this", or “deconstruction prohibits that”.

That said, certain defining features of deconstruction can be noticed. For example, Derrida's entire enterprise is predicated upon the conviction that dualisms are irrevocably present in the various philosophers and artisans that he considers. While some philosophers argue that he is a little reductive when he talks about the Western philosophical tradition, it is his understanding of this tradition that informs and provides the tools for a deconstructive response. Because of this, it is worth briefly considering the target of Derridean deconstruction - the metaphysics of presence, or somewhat synonymously, logocentrism.

a. Metaphysics of Presence/Logocentrism

There are many different terms that Derrida employs to describe what he considers to be the fundamental way(s) of thinking of the Western philosophical tradition. These include: logocentrism, phallogocentrism, and perhaps most famously, the metaphysics of presence, but also often simply 'metaphysics'. These terms all have slightly different meanings. Logocentrism emphasises the privileged role that logos, or speech, has been accorded in the Western tradition (see Section 3). Phallogocentrism points towards the patriarchal significance of this privileging. Derrida's enduring references to the metaphysics of presence borrows heavily from the work of Heidegger. Heidegger insists that Western philosophy has consistently privileged that which is, or that which appears, and has forgotten to pay any attention to the condition for that appearance. In other words, presence itself is privileged, rather than that which allows presence to be possible at all - and also impossible, for Derrida (see Section 4, for more on the metaphysics of presence). All of these terms of denigration, however, are united under the broad rubric of the term 'metaphysics'. What, then, does Derrida mean by metaphysics?

In the 'Afterword' to Limited Inc., Derrida suggests that metaphysics can be defined as:

"The enterprise of returning 'strategically', ‘ideally’, to an origin or to a priority thought to be simple, intact, normal, pure, standard, self-identical, in order then to think in terms of derivation, complication, deterioration, accident, etc. All metaphysicians, from Plato to Rousseau, Descartes to Husserl, have proceeded in this way, conceiving good to be before evil, the positive before the negative, the pure before the impure, the simple before the complex, the essential before the accidental, the imitated before the imitation, etc. And this is not just one metaphysical gesture among others, it is the metaphysical exigency, that which has been the most constant, most profound and most potent" (LI 236).

According to Derrida then, metaphysics involves installing hierarchies and orders of subordination in the various dualisms that it encounters (M 195). Moreover, metaphysical thought prioritises presence and purity at the expense of the contingent and the complicated, which are considered to be merely aberrations that are not important for philosophical analysis. Basically then, metaphysical thought always privileges one side of an opposition, and ignores or marginalises the alternative term of that opposition.

In another attempt to explain deconstruction's treatment of, and interest in oppositions, Derrida has suggested that: "An opposition of metaphysical concepts (speech/writing, presence/absence, etc.) is never the face-to-face of two terms, but a hierarchy and an order of subordination. Deconstruction cannot limit itself or proceed immediately to neutralisation: it must, by means of a double gesture, a double science, a double writing, practise an overturning of the classical opposition, and a general displacement of the system. It is on that condition alone that deconstruction will provide the means of intervening in the field of oppositions it criticises" (M 195). In order to better understand this dual 'methodology' - that is also the deconstruction of the notion of a methodology because it no longer believes in the possibility of an observer being absolutely exterior to the object/text being examined - it is helpful to consider an example of this deconstruction at work (See Speech/Writing below).

3. Key terms from the early work

Derrida's terms change in every text that he writes. This is part of his deconstructive strategy. He focuses on particular themes or words in a text, which on account of their ambiguity undermine the more explicit intention of that text. It is not possible for all of these to be addressed (Derrida has published in the vicinity of 60 texts in English), so this article focused on some of the most pivotal terms and neologisms from his early thought. It addresses aspects of his later, more theme-based thought, in Sections 6 & 7.

a. Speech/Writing

The most prominent opposition with which Derrida's earlier work is concerned is that between speech and writing. According to Derrida, thinkers as different as Plato, Rousseau, Saussure, and Levi-Strauss, have all denigrated the written word and valorised speech, by contrast, as some type of pure conduit of meaning. Their argument is that while spoken words are the symbols of mental experience, written words are the symbols of that already existing symbol. As representations of speech, they are doubly derivative and doubly far from a unity with one's own thought. Without going into detail regarding the ways in which these thinkers have set about justifying this type of hierarchical opposition, it is important to remember that the first strategy of deconstruction is to reverse existing oppositions. In Of Grammatology (perhaps his most famous work), Derrida hence attempts to illustrate that the structure of writing and grammatology are more important and even 'older' than the supposedly pure structure of presence-to-self that is characterised as typical of speech.

For example, in an entire chapter of his Course in General Linguistics, Ferdinand de Saussure tries to restrict the science of linguistics to the phonetic and audible word only (24). In the course of his inquiry, Saussure goes as far as to argue that "language and writing are two distinct systems of signs: the second exists for the sole purpose of representing the first". Language, Saussure insists, has an oral tradition that is independent of writing, and it is this independence that makes a pure science of speech possible. Derrida vehemently disagrees with this hierarchy and instead argues that all that can be claimed of writing - eg. that it is derivative and merely refers to other signs - is equally true of speech. But as well as criticising such a position for certain unjustifiable presuppositions, including the idea that we are self-identical with ourselves in 'hearing' ourselves think, Derrida also makes explicit the manner in which such a hierarchy is rendered untenable from within Saussure's own text. Most famously, Saussure is the proponent of the thesis that is commonly referred to as "the arbitrariness of the sign", and this asserts, to simplify matters considerably, that the signifier bears no necessary relationship to that which is signified. Saussure derives numerous consequences from this position, but as Derrida points out, this notion of arbitrariness and of "unmotivated institutions" of signs, would seem to deny the possibility of any natural attachment (OG 44). After all, if the sign is arbitrary and eschews any foundational reference to reality, it would seem that a certain type of sign (ie. the spoken) could not be more natural than another (ie. the written). However, it is precisely this idea of a natural attachment that Saussure relies upon to argue for our "natural bond" with sound (25), and his suggestion that sounds are more intimately related to our thoughts than the written word hence runs counter to his fundamental principle regarding the arbitrariness of the sign.

b. Arche-writing

In Of Grammatology and elsewhere, Derrida argues that signification, broadly conceived, always refers to other signs, and that one can never reach a sign that refers only to itself. He suggests that "writing is not a sign of a sign, except if one says it of all signs, which would be more profoundly true" (OG 43), and this process of infinite referral, of never arriving at meaning itself, is the notion of 'writing' that he wants to emphasise. This is not writing narrowly conceived, as in a literal inscription upon a page, but what he terms 'arche-writing'. Arche-writing refers to a more generalised notion of writing that insists that the breach that the written introduces between what is intended to be conveyed and what is actually conveyed, is typical of an originary breach that afflicts everything one might wish to keep sacrosanct, including the notion of self-presence.

This originary breach that arche-writing refers to can be separated out to reveal two claims regarding spatial differing and temporal deferring. To explicate the first of these claims, Derrida's emphasis upon how writing differs from itself is simply to suggest that writing, and by extension all repetition, is split (differed) by the absence that makes it necessary. One example of this might be that we write something down because we may soon forget it, or to communicate something to someone who is not with us. According to Derrida, all writing, in order to be what it is, must be able to function in the absence of every empirically determined addressee (M 375). Derrida also considers deferral to be typical of the written and this is to reinforce that the meaning of a certain text is never present, never entirely captured by a critic's attempt to pin it down. The meaning of a text is constantly subject to the whims of the future, but when that so-called future is itself 'present' (if we try and circumscribe the future by reference to a specific date or event) its meaning is equally not realised, but subject to yet another future that can also never be present. The key to a text is never even present to the author themselves, for the written always defers its meaning. As a consequence we cannot simply ask Derrida to explain exactly what he meant by propounding that enigmatic sentiment that has been translated as "there is nothing outside of the text" (OG 158). Any explanatory words that Derrida may offer would themselves require further explanation. [That said, it needs to be emphasised that Derrida's point is not so much that everything is simply semiotic or linguistic - as this is something that he explicitly denies - but that the processes of differing and deferring found within linguistic representation are symptomatic of a more general situation that afflicts everything, including the body and the perceptual]. So, Derrida's more generalised notion of writing, arche-writing, refers to the way in which the written is possible only on account of this 'originary' deferral of meaning that ensures that meaning can never be definitively present. In conjunction with the differing aspect that we have already seen him associate with, and then extend beyond the traditional confines of writing, he will come to describe these two overlapping processes via that most famous of neologisms: différance.

c. Différance

Différance is an attempt to conjoin the differing and deferring aspects involved in arche-writing in a term that itself plays upon the distinction between the audible and the written. After all, what differentiates différance and différence is inaudible, and this means that distinguishing between them actually requires the written. This problematises efforts like Saussure's, which as well as attempting to keep speech and writing apart, also suggest that writing is an almost unnecessary addition to speech. In response to such a claim, Derrida can simply point out that there is often, and perhaps even always, this type of ambiguity in the spoken word - différence as compared to différance - that demands reference to the written. If the spoken word requires the written to function properly, then the spoken is itself always at a distance from any supposed clarity of consciousness. It is this originary breach that Derrida associates with the terms arche-writing and différance.

Of course, différance cannot be exhaustively defined, and this is largely because of Derrida's insistence that it is "neither a word, nor a concept", as well as the fact that the meaning of the term changes depending upon the particular context in which it is being employed. For the moment, however, it suffices to suggest that according to Derrida, différance is typical of what is involved in arche-writing and this generalised notion of writing that breaks down the entire logic of the sign (OG 7). The widespread conviction that the sign literally represents something, which even if not actually present, could be potentially present, is rendered impossible by arche-writing, which insists that signs always refer to yet more signs ad infinitum, and that there is no ultimate referent or foundation. This reversal of the subordinated term of an opposition accomplishes the first of deconstruction's dual strategic intents. Rather than being criticised for being derivative or secondary, for Derrida, writing, or at least the processes that characterise writing (ie. différance and arche-writing), are ubiquitous. Just as a piece of writing has no self-present subject to explain what every particular word means (and this ensures that what is written must partly elude any individual's attempt to control it), this is equally typical of the spoken. Utilising the same structure of repetition, nothing guarantees that another person will endow the words I use with the particular meaning that I attribute to them. Even the conception of an internal monologue and the idea that we can intimately 'hear' our own thoughts in a non-contingent way is misguided, as it ignores the way that arche-writing privileges difference and a non-coincidence with oneself (SP 60-70).

d. Trace

In this respect, it needs to be pointed out that all of deconstruction's reversals (arche-writing included) are partly captured by the edifice that they seek to overthrow. For Derrida, "one always inhabits, and all the more when one does not suspect it" (OG 24), and it is important to recognise that the mere reversal of an existing metaphysical opposition might not also challenge the governing framework and presuppositions that are attempting to be reversed (WD 280). Deconstruction hence cannot rest content with merely prioritising writing over speech, but must also accomplish the second major aspect of deconstruction's dual strategies, that being to corrupt and contaminate the opposition itself.

Derrida must highlight that the categories that sustain and safeguard any dualism are always already disrupted and displaced. To effect this second aspect of deconstruction's strategic intents, Derrida usually coins a new term, or reworks an old one, to permanently disrupt the structure into which he has intervened - examples of this include his discussion of the pharmakon in Plato (drug or tincture, salutary or maleficent), and the supplement in Rousseau, which will be considered towards the end of this section. To phrase the problem in slightly different terms, Derrida's argument is that in examining a binary opposition, deconstruction manages to expose a trace. This is not a trace of the oppositions that have since been deconstructed - on the contrary, the trace is a rupture within metaphysics, a pattern of incongruities where the metaphysical rubs up against the non-metaphysical, that it is deconstruction's job to juxtapose as best as it can. The trace does not appear as such (OG 65), but the logic of its path in a text can be mimed by a deconstructive intervention and hence brought to the fore.

e. Supplement

The logic of the supplement is also an important aspect of Of Grammatology. A supplement is something that, allegedly secondarily, comes to serve as an aid to something 'original' or ‘natural’. Writing is itself an example of this structure, for as Derrida points out, "if supplementarity is a necessarily indefinite process, writing is the supplement par excellence since it proposes itself as the supplement of the supplement, sign of a sign, taking the place of a speech already significant" (OG 281). Another example of the supplement might be masturbation, as Derrida suggests (OG 153), or even the use of birth control precautions. What is notable about both of these examples is an ambiguity that ensures that what is supplementary can always be interpreted in two ways. For example, our society's use of birth control precautions might be interpreted as suggesting that our natural way is lacking and that the contraceptive pill, or condom, etc., hence replaces a fault in nature. On the other hand, it might also be argued that such precautions merely add on to, and enrich our natural way. It is always ambiguous, or more accurately 'undecidable', whether the supplement adds itself and "is a plenitude enriching another plenitude, the fullest measure of presence", or whether "the supplement supplements… adds only to replace… represents and makes an image… its place is assigned in the structure by the mark of an emptiness" (OG 144). Ultimately, Derrida suggests that the supplement is both of these things, accretion and substitution (OG 200), which means that the supplement is "not a signified more than a signifier, a representer than a presence, a writing than a speech" (OG 315). It comes before all such modalities.

This is not just some rhetorical suggestion that has no concrete significance in deconstruction. Indeed, while Rousseau consistently laments the frequency of his masturbation in his book, The Confessions, Derrida argues that "it has never been possible to desire the presence 'in person', before this play of substitution and the symbolic experience of auto-affection" (OG 154). By this, Derrida means that this supplementary masturbation that 'plays' between presence and absence (eg. the image of the absent Therese that is evoked by Rousseau) is that which allows us to conceive of being present and fulfilled in sexual relations with another at all. In a sense, masturbation is 'originary', and according to Derrida, this situation applies to all sexual relations. All erotic relations have their own supplementary aspect in which we are never present to some ephemeral 'meaning' of sexual relations, but always involved in some form of representation. Even if this does not literally take the form of imagining another in the place of, or supplementing the 'presence' that is currently with us, and even if we are not always acting out a certain role, or faking certain pleasures, for Derrida, such representations and images are the very conditions of desire and of enjoyment (OG 156).

4. Time and Phenomenology

Derrida has had a long and complicated association with phenomenology for his entire career, including ambiguous relationships with Husserl and Heidegger, and something closer to a sustained allegiance with Lévinas. Despite this complexity, two main aspects of Derrida's thinking regarding phenomenology remain clear. Firstly, he thinks that the phenomenological emphasis upon the immediacy of experience is the new transcendental illusion, and secondly, he argues that despite its best intents, phenomenology cannot be anything other than a metaphysics (SP 75, 104). In this context, Derrida defines metaphysics as the science of presence, as for him (as for Heidegger), all metaphysics privileges presence, or that which is. While they are presented schematically here, these inter-related claims constitute Derrida's major arguments against phenomenology.

According to Derrida, phenomenology is a metaphysics of presence because it unwittingly relies upon the notion of an indivisible self-presence, or in the case of Husserl, the possibility of an exact internal adequation with oneself (SP 66-8). In various texts, Derrida contests this valorisation of an undivided subjectivity, as well as the primacy that such a position accords to the 'now', or to some other kind of temporal immediacy. For instance, in Speech and Phenomena, Derrida argues that if a 'now' moment is conceived of as exhausting itself in that experience, it could not actually be experienced, for there would be nothing to juxtapose itself against in order to illuminate that very 'now'. Instead, Derrida wants to reveal that every so-called ‘present’, or ‘now’ point, is always already compromised by a trace, or a residue of a previous experience, that precludes us ever being in a self-contained 'now' moment (SP 68). Phenomenology is hence envisaged as nostalgically seeking the impossible: that is, coinciding with oneself in an immediate and pre-reflective spontaneity. Following this refutation of Husserlian temporality, Derrida remarks that "in the last analysis, what is at stake is... the privilege of the actual present, the now" (SP 62-3). Instead of emphasising the presence of a subject to themselves (ie. the so-called living-present), Derrida strategically utilises a conception of time that emphasises deferral. John Caputo expresses Derrida's point succinctly when he claims that Derrida's criticisms of Husserlian temporality in Speech and Phenomena involve an attempt to convey that: "What is really going on in things, what is really happening, is always “to come". Every time you try to stabilise the meaning of a thing, try to fix it in its missionary position, the thing itself, if there is anything at all to it, slips away" (cf. SP 104, Caputo DN 31). To put Derrida's point simplistically, it might be suggested that the meaning of a particular object, or a particular word, is never stable, but always in the process of change (eg. the dissemination of meaning for which deconstruction has become notorious). Moreover, the significance of that past change can only be appreciated from the future and, of course, that 'future' is itself implicated in a similar process of transformation were it ever to be capable of becoming 'present'. The future that Derrida is referring to is hence not just a future that will become present, but the future that makes all 'presence' possible and also impossible. For Derrida, there can be no presence-to-self, or self-contained identity, because the 'nature' of our temporal existence is for this type of experience to elude us. Our predominant mode of being is what he will eventually term the messianic (see Section 6), in that experience is about the wait, or more aptly, experience is only when it is deferred. Derrida's work offers many important temporal contributions of this quasi-transcendental variety.

5. Undecidability

In its first and most famous instantiation, undecidability is one of Derrida's most important attempts to trouble dualisms, or more accurately, to reveal how they are always already troubled. An undecidable, and there are many of them in deconstruction (eg. ghost, pharmakon, hymen, etc.), is something that cannot conform to either polarity of a dichotomy (eg. present/absent, cure/poison, and inside/outside in the above examples). For example, the figure of a ghost seems to neither present or absent, or alternatively it is both present and absent at the same time (SM).

However, Derrida has a recurring tendency to resuscitate terms in different contexts, and the term undecidability also returns in later deconstruction. Indeed, to complicate matters, undecidability returns in two discernible forms. In his recent work, Derrida often insists that the condition of the possibility of mourning, giving, forgiving, and hospitality, to cite some of his most famous examples, is at once also the condition of their impossibility (see section 7). In his explorations of these "possible-impossible" aporias, it becomes undecidable whether genuine giving, for example, is either a possible or an impossible ideal.

a. Decision

Derrida's later philosophy is also united by his analysis of a similar type of undecidability that is involved in the concept of the decision itself. In this respect, Derrida regularly suggests that a decision cannot be wise, or posed even more provocatively, that the instant of the decision must actually be mad (DPJ 26, GD 65). Drawing on Kierkegaard, Derrida tells us that a decision requires an undecidable leap beyond all prior preparations for that decision (GD 77), and according to him, this applies to all decisions and not just those regarding the conversion to religious faith that preoccupies Kierkegaard. To pose the problem in inverse fashion, it might be suggested that for Derrida, all decisions are a faith and a tenuous faith at that, since were faith and the decision not tenuous, they would cease to be a faith or a decision at all (cf. GD 80). This description of the decision as a moment of madness that must move beyond rationality and calculative reasoning may seem paradoxical, but it might nevertheless be agreed that a decision requires a 'leap of faith' beyond the sum total of the facts. Many of us are undoubtedly stifled by the difficulty of decision-making, and this psychological fact aids and, for his detractors, also abets Derrida's discussion of the decision as it appears in texts like The Gift of Death, Deconstruction and the Possibility of Justice, Adieu to Emmanuel Lévinas, and Politics of Friendship.

In Adieu to Emmanuel Lévinas, Derrida argues that a decision must always come back to the other, even if it is the other 'inside' the subject, and he disputes that an initiative which remained purely and simply "mine" would still be a decision (AEL 23-4). A theory of the subject is incapable of accounting for the slightest decision (PF 68-9), because, as he rhetorically asks, "would we not be justified in seeing here the unfolding of an egological immanence, the autonomic and automatic deployment of predicates or possibilities proper to a subject, without the tearing rupture that should occur in every decision we call free?" (AEL 24). In other words, if a decision is envisaged as simply following from certain character attributes, then it would not genuinely be a decision. Derrida is hence once more insisting upon the necessity of a leap beyond calculative reasoning, and beyond the resources of some self-contained subject reflecting upon the matter at hand. A decision must invoke that which is outside of the subject's control. If a decision is an example of a concept that is simultaneously impossible within its own internal logic and yet nevertheless necessary, then not only is our reticence to decide rendered philosophically cogent, but it is perhaps even privileged. Indeed, Derrida's work has been described as a "philosophy of hesitation", and his most famous neologism, différance, explicitly emphasises deferring, with all of the procrastination that this term implies. Moreover, in his early essay "Violence and Metaphysics", Derrida also suggests that a successful deconstructive reading is conditional upon the suspension of choice: on hesitating between the ethical opening and the logocentric totality (WD 84). Even though Derrida has suggested that he is reluctant to use the term 'ethics' because of logocentric associations, one is led to conclude that ‘ethical’ behaviour (for want of a better word) is a product of deferring, and of being forever open to possibilities rather than taking a definitive position. The problem of undecidability is also evident in more recent texts including The Gift of Death. In this text, Derrida seems to support the sacrificing of a certain notion of ethics and universality for a conception of radical singularity not unlike that evinced by the "hyper-ethical" sacrifice that Abraham makes of his son upon Mt Moriah, according to both the Judaic and Christian religions alike (GD 71). To represent Derrida's position more precisely, true responsibility consists in oscillating between the demands of that which is wholly other (in Abraham's case, God, but also any particular other) and the more general demands of a community (see Section 6). Responsibility is enduring this trial of the undecidable decision, where attending to the call of a particular other will inevitably demand an estrangement from the "other others" and their communal needs. Whatever decision one may take, according to Derrida, it can never be wholly justified (GD 70). Of course, Derrida's emphasis upon the undecidability inherent in all decision-making does not want to convey inactivity or a quietism of despair, and he has insisted that the madness of the decision also demands urgency and precipitation (DPJ 25-8). Nevertheless, what is undergone is described as the "trial of undecidability" (LI 210) and what is involved in enduring this trial would seem to be a relatively anguished being. In an interview with Richard Beardsworth, Derrida characterises the problem of undecidability as follows: "However careful one is in the theoretical preparation of a decision, the instant of the decision, if there is to be a decision, must be heterogeneous to the accumulation of knowledge. Otherwise, there is no responsibility. In this sense not only must the person taking the decision not know everything... the decision, if there is to be one, must advance towards a future which is not known, which cannot be anticipated" (NM 37). This suggestion that the decision cannot anticipate the future is undoubtedly somewhat counter-intuitive, but Derrida's rejection of anticipation is not only a rejection of the traditional idea of deciding on the basis of weighing-up and internally representing certain options. By suggesting that anticipation is not possible, he means to make the more general point that no matter how we may anticipate any decision must always rupture those anticipatory frameworks. A decision must be fundamentally different from any prior preparations for it. As Derrida suggests in Politics of Friendship, the decision must "surprise the very subjectivity of the subject" (PF 68), and it is in making this leap away from calculative reasoning that Derrida argues that responsibility consists (PF 69).

6. The Other

a. Responsibility to the Other

Perhaps the most obvious aspect of Derrida's later philosophy is his advocation of the tout autre, the wholly other, and The Gift of Death will be our main focus in explaining what this exaltation of the wholly other might mean. Any attempt to sum up this short but difficult text would have to involve the recognition of a certain incommensurability between the particular and the universal, and the dual demands placed upon anybody intending to behave responsibly. For Derrida, the paradox of responsible behaviour means that there is always a question of being responsible before a singular other (eg. a loved one, God, etc.), and yet we are also always referred to our responsibility towards others generally and to what we share with them. Derrida insists that this type of aporia, or problem, is too often ignored by the "knights of responsibility" who presume that accountability and responsibility in all aspects of life - whether that be guilt before the human law, or even before the divine will of God - is quite easily established (GD 85). These are the same people who insist that concrete ethical guidelines should be provided by any philosopher worth his or her 'salt' (GD 67) and who ignore the difficulties involved in a notion like responsibility, which demands something importantly different from merely behaving dutifully (GD 63).

Derrida's exploration of Abraham’s strange and paradoxical responsibility before the demands of God, which consists in sacrificing his only son Isaac, but also in betraying the ethical order through his silence about this act (GD 57-60), is designed to problematise this type of ethical concern that exclusively locates responsibility in the realm of generality. In places, Derrida even verges on suggesting that this more common notion of responsibility, which insists that one should behave according to a general principle that is capable of being rationally validated and justified in the public realm (GD 60), should be replaced with something closer to an Abrahamian individuality where the demands of a singular other (eg. God) are importantly distinct from the ethical demands of our society (GD 61, 66). Derrida equivocates regarding just how far he wants to endorse such a conception of responsibility, and also on the entire issue of whether Abraham's willingness to murder is an act of faith, or simply an unforgivable transgression. As he says, "Abraham is at the same time, the most moral and the most immoral, the most responsible and the most irresponsible" (GD 72). This equivocation is, of course, a defining trait of deconstruction, which has been variously pilloried and praised for this refusal to propound anything that the tradition could deem to be a thesis. Nevertheless, it is relatively clear that in The Gift of Death, Derrida intends to free us from the common assumption that responsibility is to be associated with behaviour that accords with general principles capable of justification in the public realm (ie. liberalism). In opposition to such an account, he emphasises the "radical singularity" of the demands placed upon Abraham by God (GD 60, 68, 79) and those that might be placed on us by our own loved ones. Ethics, with its dependence upon generality, must be continually sacrificed as an inevitable aspect of the human condition and its aporetic demand to decide (GD 70). As Derrida points out, in writing about one particular cause rather than another, in pursuing one profession over another, in spending time with one's family rather than at work, one inevitably ignores the "other others" (GD 69), and this is a condition of any and every existence. He argues that: "I cannot respond to the call, the request, the obligation, or even the love of another, without sacrificing the other other, the other others" (GD 68). For Derrida, it seems that the Buddhist desire to have attachment to nobody and equal compassion for everybody is an unattainable ideal. He does, in fact, suggest that a universal community that excludes no one is a contradiction in terms. According to him, this is because: "I am responsible to anyone (that is to say, to any other) only by failing in my responsibility to all the others, to the ethical or political generality. And I can never justify this sacrifice; I must always hold my peace about it... What binds me to this one or that one, remains finally unjustifiable" (GD 70). Derrida hence implies that responsibility to any particular individual is only possible by being irresponsible to the "other others", that is, to the other people and possibilities that haunt any and every existence.

b. Wholly Other/Messianic

This brings us to a term that Derrida has resuscitated from its association with Walter Benjamin and the Judaic tradition more generally. That term is the messianic and it relies upon a distinction with messianism.

According to Derrida, the term messianism refers predominantly to the religions of the Messiahs - ie. the Muslim, Judaic and Christian religions. These religions proffer a Messiah of known characteristics, and often one who is expected to arrive at a particular time or place. The Messiah is inscribed in their respective religious texts and in an oral tradition that dictates that only if the other conforms to such and such a description is that person actually the Messiah. The most obvious of numerous necessary characteristics for the Messiah, it seems, is that they must invariably be male. Sexuality might seem to be a strange prerequisite to tether to that which is beyond this world, wholly other, but it is only one of many. Now, Derrida is not simplistically disparaging religion and the messianisms they propound. In an important respect, the messianic depends upon the various messianisms and Derrida admits that he cannot say which is the more originary. The messianism of Abraham in his singular responsibility before God, for Derrida, reveals the messianic structure of existence more generally, in that we all share a similar relationship to alterity even if we have not named and circumscribed that experience according to the template provided by a particular religion. However, Derrida's call to the wholly other, his invocation for the wholly other "to come", is not a call for a fixed or identifiable other of known characteristics, as is arguably the case in the average religious experience. His wholly other is indeterminable and can never actually arrive. Derrida more than once recounts a story of Maurice Blanchot's where the Messiah was actually at the gates to a city, disguised in rags. After some time, the Messiah was finally recognised by a beggar, but the beggar could think of nothing more relevant to ask than: "when will you come?"(DN 24). Even when the Messiah is 'there', he or she must still be yet to come, and this brings us back to the distinction between the messianic and the various historical messianisms. The messianic structure of existence is open to the coming of an entirely ungraspable and unknown other, but the concrete, historical messianisms are open to the coming of a specific other of known characteristics. The messianic refers predominantly to a structure of our existence that involves waiting - waiting even in activity – and a ceaseless openness towards a future that can never be circumscribed by the horizons of significance that we inevitably bring to bear upon that possible future. In other words, Derrida is not referring to a future that will one day become present (or a particular conception of the saviour who will arrive), but to an openness towards an unknown futurity that is necessarily involved in what we take to be 'presence' and hence also renders it 'impossible'. A deconstruction that entertained any type of grand prophetic narrative, like a Marxist story about the movement of history toward a pre-determined future which, once attained, would make notions like history and progress obsolete, would be yet another vestige of logocentrism and susceptible to deconstruction (SM). Precisely in order to avoid the problems that such messianisms engender - eg. killing in the name of progress, mutilating on account of knowing the will of God better than others, etc. - Derrida suggests that: "I am careful to say 'let it come' because if the other is precisely what is not invented, the initiative or deconstructive inventiveness can consist only in opening, in uncloseting, in destabilising foreclusionary structures, so as to allow for the passage toward the other" (RDR 60).

7. Possible and Impossible Aporias

Derrida has recently become more and more preoccupied with what has come to be termed "possible-impossible aporias" - aporia was originally a Greek term meaning puzzle, but it has come to mean something more like an impasse or paradox. In particular, Derrida has described the paradoxes that afflict notions like giving, hospitality, forgiving and mourning. He argues that the condition of their possibility is also, and at once, the condition of their impossibility. In this section, I will attempt to reveal the shared logic upon which these aporias rely.

a. The Gift

The aporia that surrounds the gift revolves around the paradoxical thought that a genuine gift cannot actually be understood to be a gift. In his text, Given Time, Derrida suggests that the notion of the gift contains an implicit demand that the genuine gift must reside outside of the oppositional demands of giving and taking, and beyond any mere self-interest or calculative reasoning (GT 30). According to him, however, a gift is also something that cannot appear as such (GD 29), as it is destroyed by anything that proposes equivalence or recompense, as well as by anything that even proposes to know of, or acknowledge it. This may sound counter-intuitive, but even a simple 'thank-you' for instance, which both acknowledges the presence of a gift and also proposes some form of equivalence with that gift, can be seen to annul the gift (cf. MDM 149). By politely responding with a 'thank-you', there is often, and perhaps even always, a presumption that because of this acknowledgement one is no longer indebted to the other who has given, and that nothing more can be expected of an individual who has so responded. Significantly, the gift is hence drawn into the cycle of giving and taking, where a good deed must be accompanied by a suitably just response. As the gift is associated with a command to respond, it becomes an imposition for the receiver, and it even becomes an opportunity to take for the 'giver', who might give just to receive the acknowledgement from the other that they have in fact given. There are undoubtedly many other examples of how the 'gift' can be deployed, and not necessarily deliberately, to gain advantage. Of course, it might be objected that even if it is psychologically difficult to give without also receiving (and in a manner that is tantamount to taking) this does not in-itself constitute a refutation of the logic of genuine giving. According to Derrida, however, his discussion does not amount merely to an empirical or psychological claim about the difficulty of transcending an immature and egocentric conception of giving. On the contrary, he wants to problematise the very possibility of a giving that can be unequivocally disassociated from receiving and taking.

The important point is that, for Derrida, a genuine gift requires an anonymity of the giver, such that there is no accrued benefit in giving. The giver cannot even recognise that they are giving, for that would be to reabsorb their gift to the other person as some kind of testimony to the worth of the self - ie. the kind of self-congratulatory logic that rhetorically poses the question "how wonderful I am to give this person that which they have always desired, and without even letting them know that I am responsible?". This is an extreme example, but Derrida claims that such a predicament afflicts all giving in more or less obvious ways. For him, the logic of a genuine gift actually requires that self and other be radically disparate, and have no obligations or claims upon each other of any kind. He argues that a genuine gift must involve neither an apprehension of a good deed done, nor the recognition by the other party that they have received, and this seems to render the actuality of any gift an impossibility. Significantly, however, according to Derrida, the existential force of this demand for an absolute altruism can never be assuaged, and yet equally clearly it can also never be fulfilled, and this ensures that the condition of the possibility of the gift is inextricably associated with its impossibility. For Derrida, there is no solution to this type of problem, and no hint of a dialectic that might unify the apparent incommensurability in which possibility implies impossibility and vice versa. At the same time, however, he does not intend simply to vacillate in hyperbolic and self-referential paradoxes. There is a sense in which deconstruction actually seeks genuine giving, hospitality, forgiving and mourning, even where it acknowledges that these concepts are forever elusive and can never actually be fulfilled.

b. Hospitality

It is also worth considering the aporia that Derrida associates with hospitality. According to Derrida, genuine hospitality before any number of unknown others is not, strictly speaking, a possible scenario (OH 135, GD 70, AEL 50, OCF 16). If we contemplate giving up everything that we seek to possess and call our own, then most of us can empathise with just how difficult enacting any absolute hospitality would be. Despite this, however, Derrida insists that the whole idea of hospitality depends upon such an altruistic concept and is inconceivable without it (OCF 22). In fact, he argues that it is this internal tension that keeps the concept alive.

As Derrida makes explicit, there is a more existential example of this tension, in that the notion of hospitality requires one to be the 'master' of the house, country or nation (and hence controlling). His point is relatively simple here; to be hospitable, it is first necessary that one must have the power to host. Hospitality hence makes claims to property ownership and it also partakes in the desire to establish a form of self-identity. Secondly, there is the further point that in order to be hospitable, the host must also have some kind of control over the people who are being hosted. This is because if the guests take over a house through force, then the host is no longer being hospitable towards them precisely because they are no longer in control of the situation. This means, for Derrida, that any attempt to behave hospitably is also always partly betrothed to the keeping of guests under control, to the closing of boundaries, to nationalism, and even to the exclusion of particular groups or ethnicities (OH 151-5). This is Derrida's 'possible’ conception of hospitality, in which our most well-intentioned conceptions of hospitality render the "other others" as strangers and refugees (cf. OH 135, GD 68). Whether one invokes the current international preoccupation with border control, or simply the ubiquitous suburban fence and alarm system, it seems that hospitality always posits some kind of limit upon where the other can trespass, and hence has a tendency to be rather inhospitable. On the other hand, as well as demanding some kind of mastery of house, country or nation, there is a sense in which the notion of hospitality demands a welcoming of whomever, or whatever, may be in need of that hospitality. It follows from this that unconditional hospitality, or we might say 'impossible' hospitality, hence involves a relinquishing of judgement and control in regard to who will receive that hospitality. In other words, hospitality also requires non-mastery, and the abandoning of all claims to property, or ownership. If that is the case, however, the ongoing possibility of hospitality thereby becomes circumvented, as there is no longer the possibility of hosting anyone, as again, there is no ownership or control.

c. Forgiveness

Derrida discerns another aporia in regard to whether or not to forgive somebody who has caused us significant suffering or pain. This particular paradox revolves around the premise that if one forgives something that is actually forgivable, then one simply engages in calculative reasoning and hence does not really forgive. Most commonly in interviews, but also in his recent text On Cosmopolitanism and Forgiveness, Derrida argues that according to its own internal logic, genuine forgiving must involve the impossible: that is, the forgiving of an 'unforgivable' transgression - eg. a 'mortal sin' (OCF 32, cf. OH 39). There is hence a sense in which forgiving must be ‘mad’ and 'unconscious' (OCF 39, 49), and it must also remain outside of, or heterogenous to, political and juridical rationality. This unconditional 'forgiveness' explicitly precludes the necessity of an apology or repentance by the guilty party, although Derrida acknowledges that this pure notion of forgiveness must always exist in tension with a more conditional forgiveness where apologies are actually demanded. However, he argues that this conditional forgiveness amounts more to amnesty and reconciliation than to genuine forgiveness (OCF 51). The pattern of this discussion is undoubtedly beginning to become familiar. Derrida's discussions of forgiving are orientated around revealing a fundamental paradox that ensures that forgiving can never be finished or concluded - it must always be open, like a permanent rupture, or a wound that refuses to heal.

This forgiveness paradox depends, in one of its dual aspects, upon a radical disjunction between self and other. Derrida explicitly states that "genuine forgiveness must engage two singularities: the guilty and the victim. As soon as a third party intervenes, one can again speak of amnesty, reconciliation, reparation, etc., but certainly not of forgiveness in the strict sense" (OCF 42). Given that he also acknowledges that it is difficult to conceive of any such face-to-face encounter without a third party - as language itself must serve such a mediating function (OCF 48) – forgiveness is caught in an aporia that ensures that its empirical actuality looks to be decidedly unlikely. To recapitulate, the reason that Derrida's notion of forgiveness is caught in such an inextricable paradox is because absolute forgiveness requires a radically singular confrontation between self and other, while conditional forgiveness requires the breaching of categories such as self and other, either by a mediating party, or simply by the recognition of the ways in which we are always already intertwined with the other. Indeed, Derrida explicitly argues that when we know anything of the other, or even understand their motivation in however minimal a way, this absolute forgiveness can no longer take place (OCF 49). Derrida can offer no resolution in regard to the impasse that obtains between these two notions (between possible and impossible forgiving, between an amnesty where apologies are asked for and a more absolute forgiveness). He will only insist that an oscillation between both sides of the aporia is necessary for responsibility (OCF 51).

d. Mourning

In Memoires: for Paul de Man, which was written almost immediately following de Man's death in 1983, Derrida reflects upon the political significance of his colleague's apparent Nazi affiliation in his youth, and he also discusses the pain of losing his friend. Derrida's argument about mourning adheres to a similarly paradoxical logic to that which has been associated with him throughout this article. He suggests that the so-called 'successful' mourning of the deceased other actually fails - or at least is an unfaithful fidelity – because the other person becomes a part of us, and in this interiorisation their genuine alterity is no longer respected. On the other hand, failure to mourn the other's death paradoxically appears to succeed, because the presence of the other person in their exteriority is prolonged (MDM 6). As Derrida suggests, there is a sense in which "an aborted interiorisation is at the same time a respect for the other as other" (MDM 35). Hence the possibility of an impossible bereavement, where the only possible way to mourn, is to be unable to do so. However, even though this is how he initially presents the problem, Derrida also problematises this "success fails, failure succeeds" formulation (MDM 35).

In his essay "Fors: The Anglish Words of Nicolas Abraham and Maria Torok", Derrida again considers two models of the type of encroachment between self and other that is regularly associated with mourning. Borrowing from post-Freudian theories of mourning, he posits (although later undermines) a difference between introjection, which is love for the other in me, and incorporation, which involves retaining the other as a pocket, or a foreign body within one's own body. For Freud, as well as for the psychologists Abraham and Torok whose work Derrida considers, successful mourning is primarily about the introjection of the other. The preservation of a discrete and separate other person inside the self (psychologically speaking), as is the case in incorporation, is considered to be where mourning ceases to be a 'normal' response and instead becomes pathological. Typically, Derrida reverses this hierarchy by highlighting that there is a sense in which the supposedly pathological condition of incorporation is actually more respectful of the other person's alterity. After all, incorporation means that one has not totally assimilated the other, as there is still a difference and a heterogeneity (EO 57). On the other hand, Abraham and Torok's so-called 'normal’ mourning can be accused of interiorising the other person to such a degree that they have become assimilated and even metaphorically cannibalised. Derrida considers this introjection to be an infidelity to the other. However, Derrida's account is not so simple as to unreservedly valorise the incorporation of the other person, even if he emphasises this paradigm in an effort to refute the canonical interpretation of successful mourning. He also acknowledges that the more the self "keeps the foreign element inside itself, the more it excludes it" (Fors xvii). If we refuse to engage with the dead other, we also exclude their foreignness from ourselves and hence prevent any transformative interaction with them. When fetishised in their externality in such a manner, the dead other really is lifeless and it is significant that Derrida describes the death of de Man in terms of the loss of exchange and of the transformational opportunities that he presented (MDM xvi, cf WM). Derrida's point hence seems to be that in mourning, the 'otherness of the other' person resists both the process of incorporation as well as the process of introjection. The other can neither be preserved as a foreign entity, nor introjected fully within. Towards the end of Memoires: for Paul de Man, Derrida suggests that responsibility towards the other is about respecting and even emphasising this resistance (MDM 160, 238).

8. References and Further Reading

a. Derrida's Texts (and Their Abbreviations)

  • Acts of Literature, ed. Attridge, New York: Routledge, 1992 (AL).
  • Adieu to Emmanuel Lévinas, trans. Brault & Naas, Stanford, California: Stanford University Press, 1999 (AEL).
  • Circumfessions: Fifty Nine Periphrases, in Bennington, G., Jacques Derrida, Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1993 (Circ).
  • On Cosmopolitanism and Forgiveness, London: Routledge, 2001 (OCF).
  • Deconstruction and the Possibility of Justice, (inc. "Force of the Law"), eds. Cornell, Carlson, & Benjamin, New York: Routledge, 1992 (DPJ).
  • Dissemination, trans. Johnson, Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1981 (D).
  • "'Eating Well' or the Calculation of the Subject: An Interview with Jacques Derrida" in Who Comes After the Subject? eds. Cadava, Connor, & Nancy, New York: Routledge, 1991, p 96-119.
  • The Ear of the Other: Otobiography, Transference, Translation, trans. Kamuf, ed. McDonald, New York: Schocken Books, 1985 (EO).
  • Edmund Husserl's 'Origin of Geometry’: An Introduction, trans. Leavey, Pittsburgh: Duquesne University Press, 1978 (1962) (HOG).
  • "Fors: The Anglish Words of Nicolas Abraham and Maria Torok", trans. Johnson, in The Wolfman's Magic Word: A Cryptonomy, Abraham, N., & Torok, M., trans. Rand, Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1986 (Fors).
  • The Gift of Death, trans. Wills, Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1995 (1991) (GD).
  • Given Time: i. Counterfeit Money, trans. Kamuf, Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1992 (GT).
  • "Hostipitality" in Angelaki: Journal of the Theoretical Humanities, Vol. 5, Number 3, Dec 2000.
  • Le Toucher: Jean-Luc Nancy, Paris: Galilée, 2000 (T).
  • "Le Toucher: Touch/to touch him", in Paragraph, trans. Kamuf, 16:2, 1993, p 122-57.
  • Limited Inc. (inc. "Afterword"), ed. Graff, trans. Weber, Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 1998 edition (LI).
  • Margins of Philosophy, trans. Bass, Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1982 (M).
  • Memoires: for Paul de Man, trans. Lindsay, Culler, Cadava, & Kamuf, New York: Columbia University Press, 1989 (MDM).
  • Memoirs of the Blind: The Self-Portrait and Other Ruins, trans. Brault & Naas, Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1993 (1991) (MB).
  • Monolingualism of the Other or the Prosthesis of Origin, trans. Mensh, Stanford: Stanford University Press, 1996 (MO).
  • "Nietzsche and the Machine: Interview with Jacques Derrida" (interviewer Beardsworth) in Journal of Nietzsche Studies, Issue 7, Spring 1994 (NM). Of Grammatology, trans. Spivak, Baltimore: John Hopkins University Press, 1976 (OG).
  • Derrida, J., & Dufourmantelle, A., Of Hospitality, trans. Bowlby, Stanford: Stanford University Press, 2000 (OH).
  • On the Name (inc. "Passions"), ed. Dutoit, Stanford: Stanford University Press, 1995 (ON).
  • "Ousia and Gramme: A Note to a Footnote in Being and Time" trans. Casey in Phenomenology in Perspective, ed. Smith, The Hague: Nijhoff, 1970.
  • Parages, Paris: Galilée, 1986. Points... Interviews, 1974-1995, ed. Weber, trans. Kamuf et al, Stanford: Stanford University Press, 1995 (P).
  • Politics of Friendship, trans. Collins, New York: Verso, 1997 (PF).
  • Positions, trans. Bass, London: Athlone Press, 1981 (1972) (PO).
  • "Psyche: Inventions of the Other" in Reading De Man Reading, eds. Waters & Godzich, Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1989 (RDR).
  • Spectres of Marx: The State of the Debt, the Work of Mourning and the New International, trans. Kamuf, New York: Routledge, 1994 (SM).
  • 'Speech and Phenomena' and Other Essays on Husserl’s Theory of Signs, trans. Allison, Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 1973 (1967) (SP).
  • The Work of Mourning, eds. Brault & Naas, Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 2001 (WM).
  • Writing and Difference, trans. Bass, Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1978 (1967) (WD).

b. Selected Commentaries

  • Bennington, G., Interrupting Derrida, Warwick Studies in European Philosophy, London: Routledge, 2000.
  • Bennington, G., Jacques Derrida, Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1993.
  • Caputo, J., Deconstruction in a Nutshell, New York: Fordham University Press, 1997.
  • Caputo, J., The Prayers and Tears of Jacques Derrida, Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1997.
  • Critchley, S., The Ethics of Deconstruction: Derrida and Lévinas, Oxford, UK: Blackwell, 1992.
  • Culler, J., On Deconstruction: Theory and Criticism after Structuralism, London: Routledge and Kegan Paul, 1983.
  • Gasché, R., Inventions of Difference: On Jacques Derrida, Massachusetts: Harvard University Press, 1994. Gasché, R., The Tain of the Mirror: Derrida and the Philosophy of Reflection, Massachusetts: Harvard University Press, 1986.
  • Hart, K., The Trespass of the Sign: Deconstruction, Theology and Philosophy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1989.
  • Harvey, I., Derrida and the Economy of Différance, Studies in Phenomenology and Existential Philosophy, Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1986.
  • Howells, C., Derrida: Deconstruction from Phenomenology to Ethics, Cambridge: Polity Press, 1999.
  • Krell, D., The Purest of Bastards: Works of Art, Affirmation and Mourning in the Thought of Jacques Derrida, Pennsylvania: Pennsylvania University Press, 2000.
  • Norris, C., Derrida, Massachusetts: Harvard University Press, 1987.
  • Patrick, M., Derrida, Responsibility and Politics, Avebury Series in Philosophy, Aldershot: Ashgate Publishing, 1997.
  • Silverman, H., ed. Derrida and Deconstruction, New York: Routledge, 1989.
  • Wood, D., The Deconstruction of Time, Contemporary Studies in Philosophy and the Human Sciences, Atlantic Highlands, New Jersey: Humanities Press, 1989.
  • Wood, D., ed. Derrida: A Critical Reader, Oxford: Blackwell, 1992.
  • Wood, D., & Bernasconi, R., eds. Derrida and Différance, Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 1988.

Author Information

Jack Reynolds
La Trobe University

Ibn Rushd (Averroes) (1126—1198)

ibn RushdAbu al-Walid Muhammad ibn Ahmad ibn Rushd, better known in the Latin West as Averroes, lived during a unique period in Western intellectual history, in which interest in philosophy and theology was waning in the Muslim world and just beginning to flourish in Latin Christendom. Just fifteen years before his birth, the great critic of Islamic philosophy, al-Ghazzali (1058-1111), had died after striking a blow against Muslim Neoplatonic philosophy, particularly against the work of the philosopher Ibn Sina (Avicenna). From such bleak circumstances emerged the Spanish-Muslim philosophers, of which the jurist and physician Ibn Rushd came to be regarded as the final and most influential Muslim philosopher, especially to those who inherited the tradition of Muslim philosophy in the West.

His influential commentaries and unique interpretations on Aristotle revived Western scholarly interest in ancient Greek philosophy, whose works for the most part had been neglected since the sixth century. He critically examined the alleged tension between philosophy and religion in the Decisive Treatise, and he challenged the anti-philosophical sentiments within the Sunni tradition sparked by al-Ghazzali. This critique ignited a similar re-examination within the Christian tradition, influencing a line of scholars who would come to be identified as the “Averroists.”

Ibn Rushd contended that the claim of many Muslim theologians that philosophers were outside the fold of Islam had no base in scripture. His novel exegesis of seminal Quranic verses made the case for three valid “paths” of arriving at religious truths, and that philosophy was one if not the best of them, therefore its study should not be prohibited. He also challenged Asharite, Mutazilite, Sufi, and “literalist” conceptions of God’s attributes and actions, noting the philosophical issues that arise out of their notions of occasionalism, divine speech, and explanations of the origin of the world. Ibn Rushd strived to demonstrate that without engaging religion critically and philosophically, deeper meanings of the tradition can be lost, ultimately leading to deviant and incorrect understandings of the divine.

This article provides an overview of Ibn Rushd’s contributions to philosophy, emphasizing his commentaries, his original works in Islamic philosophy, and his lasting influence on medieval thought and the Western philosophical tradition.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Note on Commentaries
  3. Philosophy and Religion
  4. Existence and Attributes of God
  5. Origin of the World
  6. Metaphysics
  7. Psychology
  8. Conclusion
  9. References and Further Reading a. Primary Sources
    b. Secondary Sources

1. Biography

Ibn Rushd was born in Cordova, Spain, to a family with a long and well-respected tradition of legal and public service. His grandfather, the influential Abdul-Walid Muhammad (d. 1126), was the chief judge of Cordova, under the Almoravid dynasty, establishing himself as a specialist in legal methodology and in the teachings of the various legal schools. Ibn Rushd's father, Abdul-Qasim Ahmad, although not as venerated as his grandfather, held the same position until the Almoravids were ousted by the Almohad dynasty in 1146.

Ibn Rushd's education followed a traditional path, beginning with studies in hadith, linguistics, jurisprudence and scholastic theology. The earliest biographers and Muslim chroniclers speak little about his education in science and philosophy, where most interest from Western scholarship in him lies, but note his propensity towards the law and his life as a jurist. It is generally believed that Ibn Rushd was influenced by the philosophy of Ibn Bajjah (Avempace), and perhaps was once tutored by him. His medical education was directed under Abu Jafar ibn Harun of Trujillo. His aptitude for medicine was noted by his contemporaries and can be seen in his major enduring work Kitab al-Kulyat fi al-Tibb (Generalities) This book, together with Kitab al-Taisir fi al-Mudawat wa al-Tadbir (Particularities) written by Abu Marwan Ibn Zuhr, became the main medical textbooks for physicians in the Jewish, Christian and Muslim worlds for centuries to come.

Ibn Rushd traveled to Marrakesh and came under the patronage of the caliph 'Abd al-Mu'min, likely involved in educational reform for the dynasty. The Almohads, like the Almoravids they had supplanted, were a Northwest African Kharijite-influenced Berber reform movement. Founded in the theology of Ibn Tumart (1078-1139), who emphasized divine unity and the idea of divine promise and threat, he believed that a positive system of law could co-exist with a rational and practical theology. This led to the concept that law needed to be primarily based on revelation instead of the traditions of the jurists. Ibn Talmart's theology affirmed that the existence and essence of God could be established through reason alone, and used that to posit an ethical legal theory that depended on a divine transcendence.

Ibn Rushd's relationship with the Almohad was not merely opportunistic, (considering the support his father and grandfather had given to the Almoravids) for it influenced his work significantly; notably his ability to unite philosophy and religion. Sometime between 1159 and 1169, during one of his periods of residence in Marrakesh, Ibn Rushd befriended Ibn Tufayl (Abubacer), a philosopher who was the official physician and counselor to Caliph Abu Yaqub Yusuf, son of 'Abd al-Mu'min. It was Ibn Tufayl who introduced Ibn Rushd to the ruler. The prince was impressed by the young philosopher and employed him first as chief judge and later as chief physician. Ibn Rushd’s legacy as the commentator of Aristotle was also due to Abu Yaqub Yusuf. Although well-versed in ancient philosophy, the prince complained about the challenge posed by the Greek philosopher’s texts and commissioned Ibn Rushd to write a series of commentaries on them.

Through most of Ibn Rushd's service, the Almohads grew more liberal, leading eventually to their formal rejection of Ibn Talmart’s theology and adoption of Malikite law in 1229. Despite this tendency, public pressure against perceived liberalizing tendencies in the government led to the formal rejection of Ibn Rushd and his writings in 1195. He was exiled to Lucena, a largely Jewish village outside of Cordoba, his writings were banned and his books burned. This period of disgrace did not last long, however, and Ibn Rushd returned to Cordoba two years later, but died the following year. Doubts about Ibn Rushd’s orthodoxy persisted, but as Islamic interest in his philosophy waned, his writings found new audiences in the Christian and Jewish worlds.

2. Note on Commentaries

While this article focuses on Ibn Rushd's own philosophical writings, a word about the significant number of commentaries he wrote is important. Ibn Rushd wrote on many subjects, including law and medicine. In law he outshone all his predecessors, writing on legal methodology, legal pronouncements, sacrifices and land taxes. He discussed topics as diverse as cleanliness, marriage, jihad and the government’s role with non-Muslims. As for medicine, in addition to his medical encyclopedia mentioned above, Ibn Rushd wrote a commentary on Avicenna’s medical work and a number of summaries on the works of Galen. Besides his own philosophical and theological work, Ibn Rushd wrote extensive commentaries on the texts of a wide range of thinkers. These commentaries provide interesting insights into how Ibn Rushd arrived at certain positions and how much he was authentically Aristotelian. Commissioned to explain Aristotle Ibn Rushd spent three decades producing multiple commentaries on all of Aristotle’s works, save his Politics, covering every subject from aesthetics and ethics to logic and zoology. He also wrote about Plato’s Republic, Alexander’s De Intellectu, the Metaphysics of Nicolaus of Damascus, the Isagoge of Porphyry, and the Almajest of Ptolemy. Ibn Rushd would often write more than one commentary on Aristotle’s texts; for many he wrote a short or paraphrase version, a middle version and a long version. Each expanded his examination of the originals and their interpretations by other commentators, such as Alexander of Aphrodisias, Themistius and Ibn Bajjah, The various versions were meant for readers with different levels of understanding.

Ibn Rushd's desire was to shed the prevalent Neoplatonic interpretations of Aristotle, and get back to what the Greek thinker originally had intended to communicate. Of course, Ibn Rushd did not shy away from inserting his own thoughts into his commentaries, and his short paraphrase commentaries were often flexible interpretations. At times, in an effort to explain complex ideas in Aristotle, Ibn Rushd would rationalize the philosopher in directions that would not seem authentic to contemporary interpreters of Aristotle. Nevertheless, Ibn Rushd’s commentaries came to renew Western intellectual interest in Aristotle, whose works had been largely ignored or lost since the sixth century.

3. Philosophy and Religion

Until the eighth century, and the rise of the Mutazilite theology, Greek philosophy was viewed with suspicion. Despite the political support given to philosophy because of the Mutazilites and the early philosophers, a strong anti-philosophical movement rose through theological schools like the Hanbalites and the Asharites. These groups, particular the latter, gained public and political influence throughout the tenth and eleventh century Islamic world. These appealed to more conservative elements within society, to those who disliked what appeared to be non-Muslim influences. Ibn Rushd, who served a political dynasty that had come into power under a banner of orthodox reform while privately encouraging the study of philosophy, was likely sensitive to the increasing tensions that eventually led to his banishment. Though written before his exile his Decisive Treatise provides an apologetic for those theologians who charged philosophers with unbelief.

Ibn Rushd begins with the contention that Law commands the study of philosophy. Many Quranic verses, such as "Reflect, you have a vision" (59.2) and “they give thought to the creation of heaven and earth” (3:191), command human intellectual reflection upon God and his creation. This is best done by demonstration, drawing inferences from accepted premises, which is what both lawyers and philosophers do. Since, therefore, such obligation exists in religion, then a person who has the capacity of “natural intelligence” and “religious integrity” must begin to study philosophy. If someone else has examined these subjects in the past, the believer should build upon their work, even if they did not share the same religion. For, just as in any subject of study, the creation of knowledge is built successively from one scholar to the next. This does not mean that the ancients' teachings should be accepted uncritically, but if what is found within their teachings is true, then it should not be rejected because of religion. (Ibn Rushd illustrated this point by citing that when a sacrifice is performed with the prescribed instrument, it does not matter if the owner of the instrument shares the same religion as the one performing the sacrifice.)

The philosopher, when following the proper order of education, should not be harmed by his studies, hence it is wrong to forbid the study of philosophy. Any harm that may occur is accidental, like that of the side effects of medicine, or from choking on water when thirsty. If serious harm comes from philosophical study, Ibn Rushd suggests that this is because the student was dominated by their passions, had a bad teacher or suffered some natural deficiency. Ibn Rushd illustrates this by quoting a saying of the Prophet Muhammad, when asked by a man about his brother's diarrhea. The Prophet suggested that the brother should drink honey. When the man returned to say that his brother’s diarrhea had worsened, the Prophet replied, "Allah has said the truth, but your brother's abdomen has told a lie" (Bukhari 7.71.588).

Not all people are able to find truth through philosophy, which is why the Law speaks of three ways for humans to discover truth and interpret scripture: the demonstrative, the dialectical and the rhetorical. These, for Ibn Rushd, divide humanity into philosophers, theologians and the common masses. The simple truth is that Islam is the best of all religions, in that, consistent with the goal of Aristotelian ethics, it produces the most happiness, which is comprised of the knowledge of God. As such, one way is appointed to every person, consistent with their natural disposition, so that they can acquire this truth.

For Ibn Rushd, demonstrative truth cannot conflict with scripture (i.e. Qur'an), since Islam is ultimate truth and the nature of philosophy is the search for truth. If scripture does conflict with demonstrative truth, such conflict must be only apparent. If philosophy and scripture disagree on the existence of any particular being, scripture should be interpreted allegorically. Ibn Rushd contends that allegorical interpretation of scripture is common among the lawyers, theologians and the philosophers, and has been long accepted by all Muslims; Muslims only disagree on the extent and propriety of its use. God has given various meanings and interpretations, both apparent and hidden, to numerous scriptures so as to inspire study and to suit diverse intelligences. The early Muslim community, according to Ibn Rushd, affirmed that scripture had both an apparent meaning and an inner meaning. If the Muslim community has come to a consensus regarding the meaning of any particular passage, whether allegorical or apparent, no one can contradict that interpretation. If there is no consensus about a particular passage, then its meaning is free for interpretation. The problem is that, with the international diversity and long history of Islam, it is all but impossible to establish a consensus on most verses. For no one can be sure to have gathered all the opinions of all scholars from all times. With this in mind, according to Ibn Rushd, scholars like al-Ghazzali should not charge philosophers with unbelief over their doctrines of the eternity of the universe, the denial of God's knowledge of particulars, or denial of bodily resurrection. Since the early Muslims accepted the existence of apparent and allegorical meanings of texts, and since there is no consensus on these doctrines, such a charge can only be tentative. Philosophers have been divinely endowed with unique methods of learning, acquiring their beliefs through demonstrative arguments and securing them with allegorical interpretation.

Therefore, the theologians and philosophers are not so greatly different, that either should label the other as irreligious. And, like the philosophers, the theologians interpret certain texts allegorically, and such interpretations should not be infallible. For instance, he contends that even the apparent meaning of scripture fails to support the theologian's doctrine of creation ex nihilo. He highlights texts like 11:7, 41:11 and 65:48, which imply that objects such as a throne, water and smoke pre-existed the formation of the world and that something will exist after the End of Days.

A teacher, then, must communicate the interpretation of scripture proper for his respective audiences. To the masses, Ibn Rushd cautions, a teacher must teach the apparent meaning of all texts. Higher categories of interpretations should only be taught to those who are qualified through education. To teach the masses a dialectical or demonstrative interpretation, as Ibn Rushd contends Ghazzali did in his Incoherence, is to hurt the faith of the believers. The same applies to teaching a theologian philosophical interpretations.

4. Existence and Attributes of God

Ibn Rushd, shortly after writing his Decisive Treatise, wrote a treatise on the doctrine of God known as Al-Kashf 'an Manahij al-Adilla fi ‘Aqaid al-Milla (the Exposition of the Methods of Proof Concerning the Beliefs of the Community). His goal was to examine the religious doctrines that are held by the public and determine if any of the many doctrines expounded by the different sects were the intention of the "lawgiver." In particular he identifies four key sects as the targets of his polemic, the Asharites, Mutazilites, the Sufis and the “literalists,” claiming that they all have distorted the scriptures and developed innovative doctrines not compatible with Islam. Ibn Rushd's polemic, then, becomes a clear expression of his doctrine on God. He begins with examining the arguments for the existence of God given by the different sects, dismissing each one as erroneous and harmful to the public. Ibn Rushd contends that there are only two arguments worthy of adherence, both of which are found in the "Precious Book;" for example, surahs 25:61, 78:6-16 and 80:24-33. The first is the argument of “providence,” in which one can observe that everything in the universe serves the purpose of humanity. Ibn Rushd speaks of the sun, the moon, the earth and the weather as examples of how the universe is conditioned for humans. If the universe is, then, so finely-tuned, then it bespeaks of a fine tuner - God. The second is the argument of “invention,” stemming from the observation that everything in the world appears to have been invented. Plants and animals have a construction that appears to have been designed; as such a designer must have been involved, and that is God.

From establishing the existence of God, Ibn Rushd turns to explaining the nature and attributes of God. Beginning with the doctrine of divine unity, Ibn Rushd challenges the Asharite argument that there cannot, by definition, be two gods for any disagreement between them would entail that one or both cannot be God. This, of course, means that, in the case of two gods, at least one's will would be thwarted in some fashion at some time by the other; and such an event would mean that they are not omnipotent, which is a essential trait of deity. Ibn Rushd’s critique turns the apologetic on its head, contending that if there were two gods, there is an equal possibility of both gods working together, which would mean that both of their wills were fulfilled. Furthermore, Ibn Rushd adds, even disagreement would not thwart divine will, for alternatives could occur giving each god its desire. Such arguments lead to absurdity and are not fit for the masses. The simple fact is that reason affirms divine unity, which, by definition, is a confession of God’s existence and the denial of any other deity.

Ibn Rushd maintains, as did most of his theologian contemporaries that there are seven divine attributes, analogous to the human attributes. These attributes are: knowledge, life, power, will, hearing, vision and speech. For the philosopher, the attribute of knowledge occupied much space in his writing on the attributes of God. He contends, especially in his Epistle Dedicatory and his Decisive Treatise that divine knowledge is analogous to human knowledge only in name, human knowledge is the product of effect and divine knowledge is a product of cause. God, being the cause of the universe, has knowledge based on being its cause; while humans have knowledge based on the effects of such causes.

The implication of this distinction is important, since Ibn Rushd believes that philosophers who deny God's knowledge of particulars are in error. God knows particulars because he is the cause of such things. But this raises an important question: does God’s knowledge change with knowledge of particulars? That is, when events or existents move from non-existence to existence, does God’s knowledge change with this motion? Change in divine knowledge would imply divine change, and for medieval thinkers it was absurd to think that God was not immutable.

Ghazzali answered this dilemma by saying that God's knowledge does not change, only his relationship with the object. Just like a person sitting with a glass of water on their left side does not fundamentally change when that same glass is moved to their right side. Ibn Rushd felt that Ghazzali’s answer did not solve the dilemma, stating that a change in relationship is still change. For Ibn Rushd, then, the solution came in his contention that divine knowledge is rooted in God being the eternal Prime Mover—meaning that God eternally knows every action that will be caused by him. God, therefore, does not know that event when it occurs, as humans would, because he has always known it.

As for the other traits, Ibn Rushd next turns to the attribute of life, simply stating that life necessarily flows from the attribute of knowledge, as evidenced in the world around us. Divine will and power are defined as essential characteristics of God, characteristics that define God as God. This is because the existence of any created being implies the existence of an agent that willed its existence and had the power to do so. (The implication of this, Ibn Rushd notes, is that the Asharite concept that God had eternally willed the existence of the world, but created it at some particular point in time, is illogical.)

In regards to divine speech, Ibn Rushd is aware of the great theological debate in Islam about whether the Qur'an, the embodiment of God’s speech, is temporally created or eternal. Ibn Rushd contends that the attribute of divine speech is affirmed because it necessarily flows from the attributes of knowledge and power, and speech is nothing more than these. Divine speech, Ibn Rushd notes, is expressed through intermediaries, whether the work of the angels or the revelations given to the prophets. As such, "the Qur’an…is eternal but the words denoting it are created by God Almighty, not by men." The Qur’an, therefore, differs from words found elsewhere, in that the words of the Qur’an are directly created by God, while human words are our own work given by God’s permission.

Ibn Rushd concludes by discussing divine hearing and vision, and notes that scripture relates these attributes to God in the sense that he perceives things in existing things that are not apprehended by the intellect. An artisan would know everything in an artifact he had created, and two means of this knowledge would be sight and sound. God, being God, would apprehend all things in creation through all modes of apprehension, and as such would have vision and hearing.

5. Origin of the World

Turning from the attributes of God to the actions of God, where he delineates his view of creation, Ibn Rushd in his Tahafut al-Tahafut clearly deals with the charge against the philosopher's doctrine on the eternity of the physical universe in his polemic against al-Ghazzali. Ghazzali perceived that the philosophers had misunderstood the relationship between God and the world, especially since the Qur’an is clear on divine creation. Ghazzali, sustaining the Asharite emphasis on divine power, questioned why God, being the ultimate agent, could not simply create the world ex nihilo and then destroy it in some future point in time? Why did there need to be some obstacle to explain a delay in God’s creative action? In response to this, Ghazzali offered a number of lengthy proofs to challenge the philosopher’s assertions.

Ibn Rushd, who often labeled Ghazzali's arguments dialectical, sophistical or feeble, merely replied that the eternal works differently than the temporal. As humans, we can willfully decide to perform some action and then wait a period of time before completing it. For God, on the other hand, there can be no gap between decision and action; for what differentiates one time from another in God’s mind? Also, what physical limits can restrict God from acting? Ibn Rushd, in the first discussion, writes about how Ghazzali confused the definition of eternal and human will, making them univocal. For humans, the will is the faculty to choose between two options, and it is desire that compels the will to choose. For God, however, this definition of will is meaningless. God cannot have desire because that would entail change within the eternal when the object of desire was fulfilled. Furthermore, the creation of the world is not simply the choice between two equal alternatives, but a choice of existence or non-existence. Finally, if all the conditions for action were fulfilled, there would not be any reason for God not to act. God, therefore, being omniscient and omnipotent would have known from the eternal past what he had planned to create, and without limit to his power, there would no condition to stop the creation from occurring.

Ghazzali's argument follows the typical Asharite kalam cosmological argument, in that he argues the scientific evidence for the temporal origin of the world, and reasons from that to the existence of a creator. Ghazzali’s first proof contends that the idea of the infinite number of planetary revolutions as an assumption of the eternity of the world is erroneous since one can determine their revolution rates and how much they differ when compared one to another. Ibn Rushd weakly maintains that the concept of numbered planetary revolutions and their division does not apply to eternal beings. To say that the eternal can be divided is absurd since there can be no degrees to the infinite. Oliver Leaman explains how Ibn Rushd accepted accidental but not essential infinite series of existents. There can be an infinite chain of human sexual generation, but those beings that are essentially infinite have neither beginning nor end and thus cannot be divided.

In his Decisive Treatise Ibn Rushd summarily reduces the argument between the Asharite theologians and the ancient philosophers to one of semantics. Both groups agree that there are three classes of being, two extremes and one intermediate being. They agree about the name of the extremes, but disagree about the intermediate class. One extreme is those beings that are brought into existence by something (matter), from something other than itself (efficient cause) and originate in time. The second, and opposite, class is that which is composed of nothing, caused by nothing and whose existence is eternal; this class of being is demonstratively known as God. The third class, is that which is comprised of anything or is not preceded by time, but is brought into existence by an agent; this is what is known as the world. Theologians affirm that time did not exist before the existence of the world, since time is related to the motion of physical bodies. They also affirm that the world exists infinitely into the future. As such, since the philosophers accept these two contentions, the two groups only disagree on the existence of the world in the eternal past.

Since the third class relates to both the first and second classes, the dispute between the philosophers and the theologians is merely how close the third class is to one of the other two classes. If closer to the first class, it would resemble originated beings; if closer to the second class, it would resemble more the eternal being. For Ibn Rushd, the world can neither be labeled pre-eternal nor originated, since the former would imply that the world is uncaused and the latter would imply that the world is perishable.

Ibn Rushd finds pre-existing material forms in Quranic texts such as 11:9, where he maintains that one finds a throne and water pre-existing the current forms of the universe; he contends that the theologians' interpretation of such passages are arbitrary. This is because nowhere in the Qur’an is the idea of God existing as pure being before the creation of the world to be found.

The debate for Ibn Rushd and Ghazzali centers, ultimately, upon the idea of causation. Ghazzali, the dedicated Asharite, wants to support the position that God is the ultimate cause of all actions; that no being in the universe is the autonomous cause of anything. For instance, a spark put on a piece of wood does not cause fire; rather God causes the fire and has allowed the occasion of spark and wood to be the method by which he creates fire. God, if he so desired, could simply will fire not to occur when a spark and wood meet. For Ghazzali, this is the explanation of the occurrence of miracles: divine creative actions that suspend laws habitually accepted by humans. Ghazzali, in his Tahafut, speaks of the decapitated man continuing to live because God willed it so.

Ibn Rushd, the consummate Aristotelian, maintains in his Tahafut Aristotle's contention that a full explanation of any event or existence needs to involve a discussion of the material, formal, efficient and final cause. Ibn Rushd, then, insists that Ghazzali’s view would be counter-productive to scientific knowledge and contrary to common-sense. The universe, according to the human mind, works along certain causal principles and the beings existing within the universe contain particular natures that define their existence; if these natures, principles and characteristics were not definitive, then this would lead to nihilism (i.e. the atheistic materialists found in the Greek and Arab worlds). As for the idea of cause and effect being a product of habitual observation, Ibn Rushd asks if such observations are a product of God's habit or our own observations. It cannot, he asserts, be the former, since the Qur’an speaks of God’s actions as unalterable. If the latter, the idea of habit applies only to animate beings, for the habitual actions of inanimate objects are tantamount to physical laws of motion.

6. Metaphysics

Metaphysics, for Ibn Rushd, does not simply deal with God or theology; rather it concerns itself with different classes of being and the analogical idea of being. It is, thus, a science that distinguishes inferior classes of being from real being. Ibn Rushd, the adamant Aristotelian, puts his own slant on Aristotle's metaphysics. Ibn Rushd’s classification of being begins with accidental substances, which are physical beings, then moves to being of the soul / mind and finally discusses whether the substance existing outside the soul, such as the sphere of the fixed stars, is material or immaterial. This hierarchy, notes Charles Genequand, differs from Aristotle's hierarchy of material beings, beings of the soul / mind and unchangeable entities. The first and third categories of both thinkers are somewhat similar in that they encompass a straight demarcation between material and immaterial being. Ibn Rushd’s second class of being, however, includes both universals and mathematical beings; and as such cannot be the bridge between physics and metaphysics as it is in Aristotle. Rather, he contended that all autonomous beings, whether material or not, constitute a single category. This was likely a response to the more materialistic interpretations of Aristotle, such as that of Alexander of Aphrodisias, for Ibn Rushd did not see physics and the metaphysical at opposite sides of the spectrum.

Substance, not beings of the mind, was the common link between physics and metaphysics for Ibn Rushd. Substance, therefore, has an ontological, though not necessarily temporal, priority over other parts of being. Since, then, metaphysics covers both sensible and eternal substances, its subject matter overlaps with that of physics. In the cosmos, then, there are two classes of eternal things, the essentially eternal and the numerically eternal. This division represents the separation between the celestial realm and the physical universe, where the living beings in the latter are bound to an eternal cycle of generation and corruption, while the former are immortal animals. Ibn Rushd does not contend that celestial bodies cause the world, rather the motion of these bodies are the "principle" of what occurs on earth.

This point is more fully developed in Ibn Rushd's discussion regarding spontaneous generation: the idea that certain beings are created by external agents without being subject to the cycle of generation and corruption. This was a common subject of debate throughout later Greek and medieval philosophy. If beings like insects spontaneously generated from rotting food are externally generated, therein lies proof for a created universe and Asharite occasionalism, neither of which Ibn Rushd maintains. His solution is the Aristotelian doctrine of emanation, which states that no being is created but merely is the principle that unites matter and form. Since Ibn Rushd asserts that physical generation is the product of both seed, which contains forms in potentiality, and solar heat, the sun being a heavenly being; spontaneous generation, in which the seed is absent, is merely the effect of solar heat upon the basic elements (i.e. earth and water).

In the cosmological sphere, according to physics, one finds things that are both moving and moved at once and things that are only moved. Therefore, there must be something that imparts motion but is never moved; this is the Prime Mover (i.e. God). Physics, thus, provides the proof for the existence of a Prime Mover, and metaphysics is concerned with the action of this mover. The Prime Mover is the ultimate agent for Ibn Rushd and it must be eternal and pure actuality. It did not merely push the universe into existence and remain idle thereafter, for the universe would slip into chaos. Ibn Rushd acknowledges that the idea of actuality being essentially prior to potentiality counters common sense, but to accept the opposite would entail the possibility of spontaneous movement or negation of movement within the universe.

How, then, is the Prime Mover the principle of motion and causation in the cosmos without being moved itself? Ibn Rushd contends that the Prime Mover moves the cosmos, particularly the celestial bodies, by being the object of desire. Celestial beings have souls, which possess the higher power of intellect and desire, and these beings desire the perfection of God, thereby they move accordingly. Desire in the celestial beings, according to Ibn Rushd, is not the real faculty it is in humans. Since these beings have no sense perception, desire is united with intellect causing a desire for what rationally is perfection - the Prime Mover.

Ibn Rushd rejects the Arab Neoplatonic doctrine of emanation because it simply implies a temporal succession of one being producing another, which is impossible for eternal beings. By this rejection, however, Ibn Rushd recognizes a problem within his system. If God is intellectually present within the celestial bodies, there is no need for them to move in an effort to acquire this perfection. Ibn Rushd responds with an analogy of a cabinet-maker, who has the idea of a cabinet existing in his mind, but his body needs to move in order to imprint this idea upon matter. Celestial beings move in likewise matter, in order to obtain perfection, which produces the physical universe. Furthermore, this effort to obtain perfection in the celestial bodies, which is in imitation of God, effects the order of the universe.

With the Prime Mover, the celestial bodies and the physical world, Ibn Rushd has a three level cosmological view. He illustrates his cosmological order by using the analogy of the state, where everyone obeys and imitates the king. All smaller social units in the kingdom, like the family, are subordinate to the head, which is ultimately under the authority of the king. There is a hierarchy among the spheres of celestial beings, based on their "nobility" (sharaf) and not, as Avicenna held, on their order in emanation. Of course, the order of nobility parallels emanation's order, for the hierarchical order is that which we see in the universe, the fixed stars, the planets, the moon and the earth. Like a king, the Prime Mover imparts motion only to the First Body (the sphere of the fixed stars), which becomes the intermediary for the other bodies. This leads to the other spheres (i.e. planets) to desire both the Prime Mover and the First Body, which, according to Ibn Rushd, explains how the celestial bodies move from east to west at one time and from west to east at another time. It is the desire of one that moves the planets in one way, and the desire of the other that moves them in the opposite direction.

Ultimately, as H. Davidson notes, Ibn Rushd has a cosmos in which the earth is its physical center. Surrounding the earth, at different levels, are the celestial spheres, which contain celestial bodies (e.g. the sun, moon, stars and planets), which all revolve around the earth. The motion of these spheres is attributed to immortal intelligences, governed by a primary immutable and impersonal cause. Each sphere exists in its own right, though somehow the intelligence is caused by the Prime Mover, and it is through their contemplation of the Prime Mover they receive perfection equivalent to the position they hold in the cosmological hierarchy. As such, God no longer is restricted to being a cause of one thing. The active intellect is the last sphere in the hierarchy, but is not the product of another, and like the other intelligences its cognition is fixed on God. This idea has significant influence on Ibn Rushd's doctrine of the human soul and intellect.

7. Psychology

Like Aristotle, Ibn Rushd views the study of the psyche as a part of physics, since it is related specifically to the generable and corruptible union of form and matter found in the physical world and passed from generation to generation through the seed and natural heat. Ibn Rushd's views on psychology are most fully discussed in his Talkbis Kitab al-Nafs (Aristotle on the Soul). Here Ibn Rushd, as M. Fakhry comments, divided the soul into five faculties: the nutritive, the sensitive, the imaginative, the appetitive and the rational. The primary psychological faculty of all plants and animals is the nutritive or vegetative faculty, passed on through sexual generation, as noted above. The remaining four higher faculties are dependent on the nutritive faculty and are really perfections of this faculty, the product of a nature urging to move higher and higher.

The nutritive faculty uses natural heat to convert nutrients from potentiality to actuality, which are essential for basic survival, growth and reproduction of the living organism. , This faculty is an active power which is moved by the heavenly body (Active Intellect). Meanwhile, the sensitive faculty is a passive power divided into two aspects, the proximate and the ultimate, in which the former is moved within the embryo by the heavenly body and the latter is moved by sensible objects. The sensitive faculty in finite, in that it is passive, mutable, related to sensible forms and dependent upon the animal's physical senses (e.g. touch or vision). A part of these senses, notes Fakhry, is the sensus communis, a sort of sixth sense that perceives common sensibles (i.e. objects that require more than one sense to observe), discriminates among these sensibles, and comprehends that it perceives. Benmakhlouf notes that the imaginative faculty is dependent on the sensitive faculty, in that its forms result from the sensible forms, which Fakhry contends are stored in sensus communis. It differs from the sensitive faculty, however, by the fact that it "apprehends objects which are no longer present…its apprehensions are often false or fictitious," and it can unite individual images of objects perceived separately. Imagination is not opinion or reasoning, since it can conceive of unfalsified things and its objects are particular not universal, and may be finite because it is mutable (moving from potentiality to actuality by the forms stored in the sensus communis). The imaginative faculty stimulates the appetitive faculty, which is understood as desire, since it imagines desirable objects. Fakhry adds that the imaginative and appetitive faculties are essentially related, in that it is the former that moves the latter to desire or reject any pleasurable or repulsive object.

The rational faculty, seen as the capstone of Ibn Rushd's psychology by Fakhry, is unlike the imaginative faculty, in that it apprehends motion in a universal way and separate from matter. It has two divisions, the practical and theoretical, given to humans alone for their ultimate moral and intellectual perfection. The rational faculty is the power that allows humanity to create, understand and be ethical. The practical is derived from the sensual and imaginative faculties, in that it is rooted in sensibles and related to moral virtues like friendship and love. The theoretical apprehends universal intelligibles and does not need an external agent for intellectualization, contrary to the doctrine of the Active Intellect in Neoplatonism.

In its effort to achieve perfection, the rational faculty moves from potentiality to actuality. In doing so it goes through a number of stages, know as the process of intellectation. Ibn Rushd had discerned, as seen in his Long Commentary on De Anima, five distinct meanings of the Aristotelian intellect. They were, first and foremost, the material (potential) and the active (agent) intellects.

There is evidence of some evolution in Ibn Rushd's thought on the intellect, notably in his Middle Commentary on De Anima where he combines the positions of Alexander and Themistius for his doctrine on the material intellect and in his Long Commentary and the Tahafut where Ibn Rushd rejected Alexander and endorsed Themistius’ position that "material intellect is a single incorporeal eternal substance that becomes attached to the imaginative faculties of individual humans." Thus, the human soul is a separate substance ontologically identical with the active intellect; and when this active intellect is embodied in an individual human it is the material intellect. The material intellect is analogous to prime matter, in that it is pure potentiality able to receive universal forms. As such, the human mind is a composite of the material intellect and the passive intellect, which is the third element of the intellect. The passive intellect is identified with the imagination, which, as noted above, is the sense-connected finite and passive faculty that receives particular sensual forms. When the material intellect is actualized by information received, it is described as the speculative (habitual) intellect. As the speculative intellect moves towards perfection, having the active intellect as an object of thought, it becomes the acquired intellect. In that, it is aided by the active intellect, perceived in the way Aristotle had taught, to acquire intelligible thoughts. The idea of the soul's perfection occurring through having the active intellect as a greater object of thought is introduced elsewhere, and its application to religious doctrine is seen. In the Tahafut, Ibn Rushd speaks of the soul as a faculty that comes to resemble the focus of its intention, and when its attention focuses more upon eternal and universal knowledge, it become more like the eternal and universal. As such, when the soul perfects itself, it becomes like our intellect. This, of course, has impact on Ibn Rushd’s doctrine of the afterlife. Leaman contends that Ibn Rushd understands the process of knowing as a progression of detachment from the material and individual to become a sort of generalized species, in which the soul may survive death. This contradicts traditional religious views of the afterlife, which Ibn Rushd determines to be valuable in a political sense, in that it compels citizens to ethical behavior.

Elsewhere, Ibn Rushd maintains that it is the Muslim doctrine of the afterlife that best motivates people to an ethical life. The Christian and Jewish doctrines, he notes, are too focused upon the spiritual elements of the afterlife, while the Muslim description of the physical pleasures are more enticing. Of course, Ibn Rushd does not ultimately reject the idea of a physical afterlife, but for him it is unlikely.

A number of other problems remain in Ibn Rushd's doctrine of the soul and intellect. For instance, if the material intellect is one and eternal for all humans, how is it divided and individualized? His immediate reply was that division can only occur within material forms, thus it is the human body that divides and individualizes the material intellect. Nevertheless, aside from this and other problems raised, on some of which Aquinas takes him to task, Ibn Rushd succeeded in providing an explanation of the human soul and intellect that did not involve an immediate transcendent agent. This opposed the explanations found among the Neoplatonists, allowing a further argument for rejecting Neoplatonic emanation theories. Even so, notes Davidson, Ibn Rushd’s theory of the material intellect was something foreign to Aristotle.

8. Conclusion

The events surrounding Ibn Rushd towards the end of his life, including his banishment, signaled a broader cultural shift in the Islamic world. Interest in philosophy was primarily among the elite: scholars, royal patrons and civil servants. Nevertheless, its presence among the ruling elite spoke of the diversity of what it meant to be "Muslim." As interest in philosophy waned in the Muslim world after Ibn Rushd, his writings found new existence and intellectual vigor in the work of Christian and Jewish philosophers. The twelfth and thirteenth centuries saw an intellectual revival in the Latin West, with the first great universities being established in Italy, France and England. Within the walls of the University of Paris, a group of philosophers came to identify themselves with the Aristotelian philosophy presented by Ibn Rushd, particularly certain elements of its relation to religion. Later known as the "Averroists," these Christian philosophers sparked a controversy within the Roman Catholic Church about the involvement of philosophy with theology. Averroists, their accusers charged, had promoted the doctrines of one intellect for all humans, denial of the immortality of the soul, claimed that happiness can be found in this life and promoted the innovative doctrine of “double truth”. Double truth, the idea that there are two kinds of truth, religious and philosophical, was not held by Ibn Rushd himself but was an innovation of the Averroists.

Among Jewish thinkers, however, Ibn Rushd had a more positive impact. His thoughts on Aristotle and the relationship between philosophy and religion, particularly revelation, inspired a renewed interest in the interpretation of scripture and the Jewish religion. Key Jewish philosophers, such as Maimonides, Moses Narboni and Abraham ibn Ezra, became associated with Ibn Rushd in the West, even though they took Ibn Rushd's doctrines into novel directions. As such, Leaman notes, the category of a Jewish "Averroist" cannot be given to these philosophers, for their relationship with Ibn Rushd’s thought was one of critique and integration into their own philosophical systems. Nevertheless, without the work of the Spanish-Muslim philosopher, much of what occurred in medieval philosophy would have not existed. He became an example of how religions are dynamic and evolving traditions, often shaped by epistemological influences from other traditions.

9. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Ibn Rushd, with Commentary by Moses Narboni, The Epistle on the Possibility of Conjunction with the Active Intellect. K. Bland (trans.). (New York: Jewish Theological Seminary of America, 1982).
  • Ibn Rushd, Decisive Treatise & Epistle Dedicatory. C. Butterworth (trans.). (Provo: Brigham Young University Press, 2001).
  • Ibn Rushd, Faith and Reason in Islam [al-Kashf]. I. Najjar (trans.). (Oxford: Oneworld, 2001).
  • Ibn Rushd, Long Commentary on Aristotle's De Anima. A. Hyman (trans.), Philosophy in the Middle Ages (Cambridge: Hackett, 1973).
  • Ibn Rushd, Middle Commentary on Aristotle's Categories and De Interpretatione. C. Butterworth (trans.). (South Bend: St. Augustine’s Press, 1998).
  • Ibn Rushd, Tahafut al-Tahafut. S. Van Den Bergh (trans.). (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1954).
  • Ibn Rushd, Treatise Concerning the Substance of the Celestial Sphere. A. Hyman (trans.), Philosophy in the Middle Ages (Cambridge: Hackett, 1973).

b. Secondary Sources

  • J. Al-Alawi, "The Philosophy of Ibn Rushd: the Evolution of the Problem of the Intellect in the works of Ibn Rushd." Jayyusi, Salma Khadra (ed.), The Legacy of Muslim Spain, (Leiden: E.J. Brill, 1994).
  • R. Arnaldez, Ibn Rushd: A Rationalist in Islam (Notre Dame, IN: University of Notre Dame Press, 1998)
  • A. Benmakhlour, Ibn Rushd (Paris: Les Belles Lettres, 2000)
  • D. Black, "Ibn Rushd, the Incoherence of the Incoherence." The Classics of Western Philosophy: a Reader's Guide. Eds. Jorge Gracia, Gregory Reichberg and Bernard Schumacher (Oxford: Blackwell, 2003).
  • D. Black "Consciousness and Self-Knowledge in Aquinas's Critique of Ibn Rushd’s Psychology." Journal of the History of Philosophy 31.3 (July 1993): 23-59.
  • D. Black, "Memory, Time and Individuals in Ibn Rushd's Psychology." Medieval Theology and Philosophy 5 (1996): 161-187
  • H. Davidson, Alfarabi, Avicenna, and Ibn Rushd, on Intellect: Their Cosmologies, Theories of the Active Intellect and Theories of Human Intellect (New York: Oxford University Press, 1992).
  • C. Genequand, "Metaphysics." History of Islamic Philosophy. S. Nasr and O. Leaman (eds.). (New York: Routledge, 2001).
  • M. Hayoun et A. de Libera, Ibn Rushd et l'Averroisme (Paris: Presses Universitaries de France, 1991).
  • A. Hughes, The Texture of the Divine: Imagination in Medieval Islamic and Jewish Thought (Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 2003)
  • M. Fakhry, A History of Islamic Philosophy (New York: Columbia University Press, 1983)
  • M. Fakhry, Ibn Rushd (Ibn Rushd) (Oxford: Oneworld, 2001)
  • M. Fakhry, Islamic Occasionalism: and its Critique by Ibn Rushd and Aquinas (London: George Allen & Unwin, 1958).
  • I. Lapidus, A History of Islamic Societies (New York: Cambridge University Press, 1988)
  • O. Leaman, Ibn Rushd and His Philosophy (New York: Oxford University Press, 1988)
  • O. Leaman, An Introduction to Classical Islamic Philosophy (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2002)
  • O. Leaman, "Ibn Rushd" Routledge Encyclopedia of Philosophy Vol. 4. E. Craig (gen. ed.) (London: Routledge, 1998).
  • O. Mohammed, Ibn Rushd's Doctrine of Immortality: a Matter of Controversy (Waterloo: Wilfrid Laurier Press, 1984).
  • D. Urvoy, "Ibn Rushd." History of Islamic Philosophy. S. Nasr and O. Leaman (eds.). (New York: Routledge, 2001).
  • D. Urvoy, Ibn Rushd (Ibn Rushd) (London: Routledge, 1991).

Author Information

H. Chad Hillier
University of Toronto

Martin Heidegger (1889—1976)

Martin HeideggerMartin Heidegger is widely acknowledged to be one of the most original and important philosophers of the 20th century, while remaining one of the most controversial.  His thinking has contributed to such diverse fields as phenomenology (Merleau-Ponty), existentialism (Sartre, Ortega y Gasset), hermeneutics (Gadamer, Ricoeur), political theory (Arendt, Marcuse, Habermas), psychology (Boss, Binswanger, Rollo May), and theology (Bultmann, Rahner, Tillich). His critique of traditional metaphysics and his opposition to positivism and technological world domination have been embraced by leading theorists of postmodernity (Derrida, Foucault, and Lyotard). On the other hand, his involvement in the Nazi movement has invoked a stormy debate.  Although he never claimed that his philosophy was concerned with politics, political considerations have come to overshadow his philosophical work.

Heidegger’s main interest was ontology or the study of being. In his fundamental treatise, Being and Time, he attempted to access being (Sein) by means of phenomenological analysis of human existence (Dasein) in respect to its temporal and historical character. After the change of his thinking (“the turn”), Heidegger placed an emphasis on language as the vehicle through which the question of being can be unfolded. He turned to the exegesis of historical texts, especially of the Presocratics, but also of Kant, Hegel, Nietzsche and Hölderlin, and to poetry, architecture, technology, and other subjects. Instead of looking for a full clarification of the meaning of being, he tried to pursue a kind of thinking which was no longer “metaphysical.” He criticized the tradition of Western philosophy, which he regarded as nihilistic, for, as he claimed, the question of being as such was obliterated in it. He also stressed the nihilism of modern technological culture. By going to the Presocratic beginning of Western thought, he wanted to repeat the early Greek experience of being, so that the West could turn away from the dead end of nihilism and begin anew. His writings are notoriously difficult. Being and Time remains his most influential work.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Works
  2. Philosophy as Phenomenological Ontology
  3. Dasein and Temporality
  4. The Quest for the Meaning of Being
  5. Overcoming Metaphysics
  6. From the First Beginning to the New Beginning
  7. From Philosophy to Political Theory
  8. Heidegger’s Collected Works
    1. Published Writings, 1910-1976
    2. Lectures from Marburg and Freiburg, 1919-1944
    3. Private Monographs and Lectures, 1919-1967
    4. Notes and Fragments

1. Life and Works

Heidegger was born on September 26, 1889 in Messkirch in south-west Germany to a Catholic family. His father worked as sexton in the local church. In his early youth, Heidegger was being prepared for the priesthood. In 1903 he went to the high school in Konstanz, where the church supported him with a scholarship, and then, in 1906, he moved to Freiburg. His interest in philosophy first arose during his high school studies in Freiburg when, at the age of seventeen, he read Franz Brentano’s book entitled On the Manifold Meaning of Being according to Aristotle. By his own account, it was this work that inspired his life-long quest for the meaning of being. In 1909, after completing the high school, he became a Jesuit novice, but was discharged within a month for reasons of health. He then entered Freiburg University, where he studied theology. However, because of health problems and perhaps because of a lack of a strong spiritual vocation, Heidegger left the seminary in 1911 and broke off his training for the priesthood. He took up studies in philosophy, mathematics, and natural sciences. It was also at that time that he first became influenced by Edmund Husserl. He studied Husserl's Logical Investigations. In 1913 he completed a doctorate in philosophy with a dissertation on The Doctrine of Judgement in Psychologism under the direction of the neo-Kantian philosopher Heinrich Rickert.

The outbreak of the First World War interrupted Heidegger’s academic career only briefly. He was conscripted into the army, but was discharged after two months because of health reasons. Hoping to take over the chair of Catholic philosophy at Freiburg, Heidegger now began to work on a habilitation thesis, the required qualification for teaching at the university. His thesis, Duns Scotus’s Doctrine of Categories and Meaning, was completed in 1915, and in the same year he was appointed a Privatdozent, or lecturer. He taught mostly courses in Aristotelian and scholastic philosophy, and regarded himself as standing in the service of the Catholic world-view. Nevertheless, his turn from theology to philosophy was soon to be followed by another turn.

In 1916, Heidegger became a junior colleague of Edmund Husserl when the latter joined the Freiburg faculty. The following year, he married Thea Elfride Petri, a Protestant student who had attended his courses since the fall of 1915. His career was again interrupted by military service in 1918. He served for the last ten months of the war, the last three of those in a meteorological unit on the western front. Within a few weeks of his return to Freiburg, he announced his break with the “system of Catholicism” (January 9, 1919), got appointed as Husserl’s assistant (January 21, 1919), and began lecturing in a new, insightful way (February 7, 1919). His lectures on phenomenology and his creative interpretations of Aristotle would now earn him a wide acclaim. And yet, Heidegger did not simply become Husserl’s faithful follower. In particular, he was not captivated by the later developments of Husserl’s thought—by his neo-Kantian turn towards transcendental subjectivity and even less by his Cartesianism—but continued to value his earlier work, Logical Investigations. Laboring over the question of things themselves, Heidegger soon began a radical reinterpretation of Husserl’s phenomenology.

In 1923, with the support of Paul Natorp, Heidegger was appointed associate professor at Marburg University. Between 1923 and 1928, he enjoyed there the most fruitful years of his entire teaching career. His students testified to the originality of his insight and the intensity of his philosophical questioning. Heidegger extended the scope of his lectures, and taught courses on the history of philosophy, time, logic, phenomenology, Plato, Aristotle, Aquinas, Kant, and Leibniz. However, he had published nothing since 1916, a factor that threatened his future academic career. Finally, in February 1927, partly because of administrative pressure, his fundamental but also unfinished treatise, Being and Time, appeared. Within a few years, this book was recognized as a truly epoch-making work of 20th century philosophy. It earned Heidegger, in the fall of 1927, full professorship at Marburg, and one year later, after Husserl’s retirement from teaching, the chair of philosophy at Freiburg University. Although Being and Time is dedicated to Husserl, upon its publication Heidegger’s departure from Husserl’s phenomenology and the differences between two philosophers became apparent. In 1929, his next published works—“What is Metaphysics?,” “On the Essence of Ground,” and Kant and the Problem of Metaphysics—further revealed how far Heidegger had moved from neo-Kantianism and phenomenology of consciousness to his own phenomenological ontology.

Heidegger’s life entered a problematic and controversial stage with Hitler’s rise to power. In September 1930, Adolf Hitler’s National Socialist German Workers’ Party (NSDAP) became the second largest party in Germany, and on January 30, 1933 Hitler was appointed chancellor of Germany. Up to then virtually apolitical, Heidegger now became politically involved. On April 21, 1933, he was elected rector of the University of Freiburg by the faculty. He was apparently urged by his colleagues to become a candidate for this politically sensitive post, as he later claimed in an interview with Der Spiegel, to avoid the danger of a party functionary being appointed. But he also seemed to believe that he could steer the Nazi movement in the right direction. On May 3, 1933, he joined the NSDAP, or Nazi, party. On May 27, 1933, he delivered his inaugural rectoral address on The Self-Assertion of the German University.” The ambiguous text of this speech has often been interpreted as an expression of his support for Hitler’s regime. During his tenure as rector he produced a number of speeches in the Nazi cause, such as, for example, “Declaration of Support for Adolf Hitler and the National Socialist State” delivered in November 1933. There is little doubt that during that time, Heidegger placed the great prestige of his scholarly reputation at the service of National Socialism, and thus, willingly or not, contributed to its legitimization among his fellow Germans. And yet, just one year later, on April 23, 1934, Heidegger resigned from his office and took no further part in politics. His rectoral address was found incompatible with the party line, and its text was eventually banned by the Nazis. Because he was no longer involved in the party’s activities, Heidegger’s membership in the NSDAP became a mere formality. Certain restrictions were put on his freedom to publish and attend conferences. In his lecture courses of the late 1930s and early 1940s, and especially in the course entitled Hölderlin’s Hymnen “Germanien” und “Der Rein” (Hölderlin’s Hymns “Germania” and “The Rhine”) originally presented at the University of Freiburg during the winter semester of 1934/35, he expressed covert criticism of Nazi ideology. He came under attack of Ernst Krieck, semi-official Nazi philosopher. For some time he was under the surveillance of the Gestapo. His final humiliation came in 1944, when he was declared the most “expendable” member of the faculty and sent to the Rhine to dig trenches. Following Germany’s defeat in the Second World War, Heidegger was accused of Nazi sympathies. He was forbidden to teach and in 1946 was dismissed from his chair of philosophy. The ban was lifted in 1949.

The 1930s are not only marked by Heidegger’s controversial involvement in politics, but also by a change in his thinking which is known as “the turn” (die Kehre). In his lectures and writings that followed “the turn,” he became less systematic and often more obscure than in his fundamental work, Being and Time. He turned to the exegesis of philosophical and literary texts, especially of the Presocratics, but also of Kant, Hegel, Nietzsche and Hölderlin, and makes this his way of philosophizing. A recurring theme of that time was “the essence of truth.” During the decade between 1931 and 1940, Heidegger offered five courses under this title. His preoccupation with the question of language and his fascination with poetry were expressed in lectures on Hörderlin which he gave between 1934 and 1936. Towards the end of 1930s and the beginning of 1940s, he taught five courses on Nietzsche, in which he submitted to criticism the tradition of western metaphysics, described by him as nihilistic, and made allusions to the absurdity of war and the bestiality of his contemporaries. Finally, his reflection upon the western philosophical tradition and an endeavor to open a space for philosophizing outside it, brought him to an examination of Presocratic thought. In the course of lectures entitled An Introduction to Metaphysics, which was originally offered as a course of lectures in 1935, and can be seen as a bridge between earlier and later Heidegger, the Presocratics were no longer a subject of mere passing remarks as in Heidegger’s earlier works. The course was not about early Greek thought, yet the Presocratics became there the pivotal center of discussion. It is clear that with the evolution of Heidegger’s thinking in the 1930s, they gained in importance in his work. During the 1940s, in addition to giving courses on Aristotle, Kant and Hegel, Heidegger lectured extensively on Anaximander, Parmenides, and Heraclitus.

During the last three decades of his life, from the mid 1940s to the mid 1970s, Heidegger wrote and published much, but in comparison to earlier decades, there was no significant change in his philosophy. In his insightful essays and lectures, such as “What are Poets for?” (1946), “Letter on Humanism” (1947), “The Question Concerning Technology” (1953), “The Way to Language” (1959), “Time and Being” (1962), and “The End of Philosophy and the Task of Thinking” (1964), he addressed different issues concerning modernity, labored on his original philosophy of history—the history of being—and attempted to clarify his way of thinking after “the turn”. Most of his time was divided between his home in Freiburg, his second study in Messkirch, and his mountain hut in the Black Forest. But he escaped provincialism by being frequently visited by his friends (including, among the others, the political philosopher Hannah Arendt, the physicist Werner Heisenberg, the theologian Rudolf Bultmann, the psychologist Ludwig Binswanger) and by traveling more widely than ever before. He lectured on “What is Philosophy?” at Cerisy-la-Salle in 1955, and on “Hegel and the Greeks” at Aix-en-Provence in 1957, and also visited Greece in 1962 and 1967. In 1966, Heidegger attempted to justify his political involvement during the Nazi regime in an interview with Der Spiegel entitled “Only God Can Save Us”. One of his last teaching stints was a seminar on Parmenides that he gave in Zähringen in 1973. Heiddegger died on May 26, 1976, and was buried in the churchyard in Messkirch. He remained intellectually active up until the very end, working on a number of projects, including the massive Gesamtausgabe, the complete edition of his works.

2. Philosophy as Phenomenological Ontology

In order to understand Heidegger’s philosophy before “the turn”, let us first briefly consider his indebtedness to Edmund Husserl. As it has been mentioned, Heidegger was interested in Husserl from his early student years at the University of Freiburg when he read Logical Investigations. Later, when Husserl accepted a chair at Freiburg, Heidegger became his assistant. His debt to Husserl cannot be overlooked. Not only is Being and Time dedicated to Husserl, but also Heidegger acknowledges in it that without Husserl’s phenomenology his own investigation would not have been possible. How then is Heidegger’s philosophy related to the Husserlian program of phenomenology?

By “phenomenology” Husserl himself had always meant the science of consciousness and its objects; this core of sense pervades the development of this concept as eidetic, transcendental or constructive throughout his works. Following the Cartesian tradition, he saw the ground and the absolute starting point of philosophy in the subject. The procedure of bracketing is essential to Husserl’s “phenomenological reduction”—the methodological procedure by which we are led from “the natural attitude,” in which we are involved in the actual world and its affairs, to “the phenomenological attitude,” in which the analysis and detached description of the content of consciousness is possible. The phenomenological reduction helps us to free ourselves from prejudices and secure the purity of our detachment as observers, so that we can encounter “things as they are in themselves” independently of any presuppositions. The goal of phenomenology for Husserl is then a descriptive, detached analysis of consciousness, in which objects, as its correlates, are constituted.

What right does Husserl have to insist that the original mode of encounter with beings, in which they appear to us as they are as things in themselves, is the encounter of consciousness purified by phenomenological reduction and its objects? “Whence and how is it determined what must be experienced as the ‘things themselves’ in accordance with the principle of phenomenology?” These are pressing questions which Heidegger might well have asked. Perhaps because of his reverence for Husserl, he does not subject him to direct criticism in his fundamental work. Nevertheless, Being and Time is itself a powerful critique of the Husserlian phenomenology. Heidegger there gives attention to many different modes in which we exist and encounter things. He analyses the structures constitutive of things not only as they are encountered in the detached, theoretical attitude of consciousness, but also in daily life as “utensils” (Zuhandene) or in special moods, especially in anxiety (Angst). What is more, he exhibits there the structures that are constitutive of the particular kind of being which is the human being and which he calls “Dasein.” For Heidegger, it is not pure consciousness in which beings are originally constituted. The starting point of philosophy for him is not consciousness, but Dasein in its being.

The central problem for Husserl is the problem of constitution: How is the world as phenomenon constituted in our consciousness? Heidegger takes the Husserlian problem one step further. Instead of asking how something must be given in consciousness in order to be constituted, he asks: “What is the mode of being of that being in which the world constitutes itself?” In a letter to Husserl dated October 27, 1927, he states that the question of Dasein's being cannot be evaded, as far as the problem of constitution is concerned. Dasein is that being in which any being is constituted. Further, the question of Dasein's being directs him to the problem of being in general. The “universal problem of being,” he says in the same letter, “refers to that which constitutes and to that which is constituted.” While far from being dependent upon Husserl, Heidegger finds in his thought an inspiration leading him to the theme which has continued to draw his attention since his early years: the question of the meaning of being.

Phenomenology thus receives in Heidegger a new meaning. He conceives it more broadly, and more etymologically, than Husserl, as “letting what shows itself to be seen from itself, just as it shows from itself.” Husserl applies the term “phenomenology” to a whole philosophy. Heidegger takes it rather to designate a method. Since in Being and Time philosophy is described as “ontology” and has being as its theme, it cannot adopt its method from any of the actual sciences. For Heidegger the method of ontology is phenomenology. “Phenomenology,” he says, “is the way of access to what is to become the theme of ontology.” Being is to be grasped by means of the phenomenological method. However, being is always the being of a being, and accordingly, it becomes accessible only indirectly through some existing entity. Therefore, “phenomenological reduction” is necessary. One must direct oneself toward an entity, but in such a way that its being is thereby brought out. It is Dasein which Heidegger chooses as the particular entity to access being. Hence, as the basic component of his phenomenology, Heidegger adopts the Husserlian phenomenological reduction, but gives it a completely different meaning.

To sum up, Heidegger does not base his philosophy on consciousness as Husserl did. For him the phenomenological or theoretical attitude of consciousness, which Husserl makes the core of his doctrine, is only one possible mode of that which is more fundamental, namely, Dasein's being. Although he agrees with Husserl that the transcendental constitution of the world cannot be unveiled by naturalistic or physical explanations, in his view it is not a descriptive analysis of consciousness that leads to this end, but the analysis of Dasein. Phenomenology for him is not a descriptive, detached analysis of consciousness. It is a method of access to being. For the Heidegger of Being and Time, philosophy is phenomenological ontology which takes its departure from the analysis of Dasein.

3. Dasein and Temporality

In everyday German language the word “Dasein” means life or existence. The noun is used by other German philosophers to denote the existence of any entity. However, Heidegger breaks the word down to its components “Da” and “Sein,” and gives to it a special meaning which is related to his answer to the question of who the human being is. He relates this question to the question of being. Dasein, that being which we ourselves are, is distinguished from all other beings by the fact that it makes issue of its own being. It stands out to being. As Da-sein, it is the site, “Da”, for the disclosure of being, “Sein.”

Heidegger’s fundamental analysis of Dasein from Being and Time points to temporality as the primordial meaning of Dasein’s being. Dasein is essentially temporal. Its temporal character is derived from the tripartite ontological structure: existence, thrownness, and fallenness by which Dasein’s being is described. Existence means that Dasein is potentiality-for-being (Seinkönnen); it projects its being upon various possibilities. Existence represents thus the phenomenon of the future. Then, as thrownness, Dasein always finds itself already in a certain spiritual and material, historically conditioned environment; in short, in the world, in which the space of possibilities is always somehow limited. This represents the phenomenon of the past as having-been. Finally, as fallenness, Dasein exists in the midst of beings which are both Dasein and not Dasein. The encounter with those beings, “being-alongside” or “being-with” them, is made possible for Dasein by the presence of those beings within-the-world. This represents the primordial phenomenon of the present. Accordingly, Dasein is not temporal for the mere reason that it exists “in time,” but because its very being is rooted in temporality: the original unity of the future, the past and the present. Temporality cannot be identified with ordinary clock time - with simply being at one point in time, at one “Now” after another—which for Heidegger is a derivative phenomenon. Neither does Dasein’s temporality have the merely quantitative, homogeneous character of the concept of time found in natural science. It is the phenomenon of original time, of the time which “temporalizes” itself in the course of Dasein’s existence. It is a movement through a world as a space of possibilities. The “going back” to the possibilities that have been (the past) in the moment of thrownness, and their projection in the resolute movement “coming towards” (the future) in the moment of existence, which both take place in “being with” others (the present) in the moment of fallenness, provide for the original unity of the future, the past, and the present which constitutes authentic temporality.

As authentically temporal, Dasein as potentiality-for-being comes towards itself in its possibilities of being by going back to what has been; it always comes towards itself from out of a possibility of itself. Hence, it comports itself towards the future by always coming back to its past; the past which is not merely past but still around as having-been. But in this “going back” to what it has been which is constitutive together with “coming towards” and “being with” for the unity of Dasein’s temporality, Dasein hands down to itself its own historical “heritage,” namely, the possibilities of being that have come down to it. As authentically temporal, Dasein is thus authentically historical. The repetition of the possibilities of existence, of that which has been, is for Heidegger constitutive for the phenomenon of original history which is rooted in temporality.

4. The Quest for the Meaning of Being

Throughout his long academic career, Heidegger was preoccupied with the question of the meaning of being. His first formulation of this question goes as far back as his high school studies, during which he read Franz Brentano’s book On the Manifold Meaning of Being in Aristotle. In 1907, the seventeen-year-old Heidegger asked: “If what-is is predicated in manifold meanings, then what is its leading fundamental meaning? What does being mean?” The question of being, unanswered at that time, becomes the leading question of Being and Time twenty years later. Surveying the long history of the meaning attributed to “being,” Heidegger notes that in the philosophical tradition it has generally been presupposed that being is at once the most universal concept, the concept indefinable in terms of other concepts, and the self-evident concept. In short, it is a concept that is mostly taken for granted. However, Heidegger claims that even though we seem to understand being, its meaning is still veiled in darkness. Therefore, we need to restate the question of the meaning of being.

In accordance with the method of philosophy which he employs in his fundamental treatise, before attempting to provide an answer to the question of being in general, Heidegger sets out to answer the question of the being of the particular kind of entity that is the human being, which he calls Dasein. The vivid phenomenological descriptions of Dasein’s being-in-the-world, especially Dasein’s everydayness and resoluteness toward death, have attracted many readers with interests related to existential philosophy, theology, and literature. The basic concepts such as temporality, understanding, historicity, repetition, and authentic or inauthentic existence were carried over into and further explored in his later works.  Still, from the point of view of the quest for the meaning of being, Being and Time was a failure and remained unfinished. As Heidegger himself admitted in his later essay, “Letter on Humanism” (1946), the third division of its first part, entitled “Time and Being,” was held back “because thinking failed in adequate saying of the turning and did not succeed with the help of the language of metaphysics.” The second part also remained unwritten.

“The turn” (Kehre) that occurs in the 1930’s is the change in Heidegger’s thinking mentioned above.  The consequence of “the turn” is not the abandoning of the leading question of Being and Time.  Heidegger stresses the continuity of his thought over the course of the change. Nevertheless, as “everything is reversed,” even the question concerning the meaning of Being is reformulated in Heidegger’s later work. It becomes a question of the openness, that is, of the truth, of being. Furthermore, since the openness of being refers to a situation within history, the most important concept in the later Heidegger becomes the history of being.

For a reader unacquainted with Heidegger’s thought, both the “question of the meaning of being” and the expression “history of being” sound strange. In the first place, such a reader may argue that when something is said to be, there is nothing expressed which the world “Being” could properly denote. Therefore, the word “being” is a meaningless term and the Heideggerian quest for the meaning of being is in general a misunderstanding. Secondly, the reader may also think that the being of Heidegger is no more likely to have a history than the being of Aristotle, so the “history of being” is a misunderstanding as well. Nevertheless, Heidegger’s task is precisely to show that there is a meaningful concept of being. “We understand the ‘is’ we use in speaking,” he claims, “although we do not comprehend it conceptually.” Therefore, Heidegger asks: Can being then be thought? We can think of beings: a table, my desk, the pencil with which I am writing, the school building, a heavy storm in the mountains . . . but being? If the being whose meaning Heidegger seeks seems so elusive, almost like no-thing, it is because it is not an entity. It is not something; it is not a being. “Being is essentially different from a being, from beings.” The “ontological difference,” the distinction between being (das Sein) and beings (das Seiende), is fundamental for Heidegger. The forgetfulness of being that, according to him, occurs in the course of Western philosophy amounts to the oblivion of this distinction.

The conception of the history of being is of central importance in Heidegger’s thought. Already in Being and Time its idea is foreshadowed as “the destruction of the history of ontology.” In Heidegger’s later writings the story is considerably recast and called the “history of being” (Seinsgeschichte). The beginning of this story, as told by Heidegger especially in the Nietzsche lectures, is the end, the completion of philosophy by its dissolution into particular sciences and nihilism—questionlessness of being, a dead end into which the West has run. Heidegger argues that the question of being would still provide a stimulus to the research of Plato and Aristotle, but it was precisely with them that the original experience of being of the early Greeks was covered over. The fateful event was followed by the gradual slipping away of the distinction between being and beings. Described variously by different philosophers, being was reduced to a being: to idea in Plato, substantia and actualitas in Medieval philosophy, objectivity in modern philosophy, and will to power in Nietzsche and contemporary thought. The task which the later Heidegger sets before himself is then to make a way back into the primordial beginning, so that the “dead end” can be replaced by a new beginning. And since the primordial beginning of western thought lies in ancient Greece, in order to solve the problems of contemporary philosophy and reverse the course of modern history, Heidegger ultimately turns for help to the Presocratics, the first western thinkers.

5. Overcoming Metaphysics

For the later Heidegger, “western philosophy,” in which there occurs forgetfulness of being, is synonymous with “the tradition of metaphysics.” Metaphysics inquires about the being of beings, but in such a way that the question of being as such is disregarded, and being itself is obliterated. The Heideggerian “history of being” can thus be seen as the history of metaphysics, which is the history of being’s oblivion. However, looked at from another angle, metaphysics is also the way of thinking that looks beyond beings toward their ground or basis. Each metaphysics aims at the fundamentum absolutum, the ground of such a metaphysics which presents itself indubitably. In Descartes, for example, the fundamentum absolutum is attained through the “Cogito” argument. Cartesian metaphysics is characterized by subjectivity because it has its ground in the self-certain subject. Furthermore, metaphysics is not merely the philosophy which asks the question of the being of beings. At the end of philosophy—i.e., in our present age where there occurs the dissolution of philosophy into particular sciences—the sciences still speak of the being of what-is as a whole. In the wider sense of this term, metaphysics is thus, for Heidegger, any discipline which, whether explicitly or not, provides an answer to the question of the being of beings and of their ground. In medieval times such a discipline was scholastic philosophy, which defined beings as entia creatum (created things) and provided them with their ground in ens perfectissimum (the perfect being), God. Today the discipline is modern technology, through which the contemporary human being establishes himself in the world by working on it in the various modes of making and shaping. Technology forms and controls the human position in today’s world. It masters and dominates beings in various ways.

“In distinction from mastering beings, the thinking of thinkers is the thinking of being.” Heidegger believes that early Greek thinking is not yet metaphysics. Presocratic thinkers ask the question concerning the being of beings, but in such a way that being itself is laid open. They experience the being of beings as the presencing (Anwesen) of what is present (Anwesende). Being as presencing means enduring in unconcealment, disclosing. Throughout his later works Heidegger uses several words in order rightly to convey this Greek experience. What-is, what is present, the unconcealed, is “what appears from out of itself, in appearing shows itself , and in this self-showing manifests.” It is the “emerging arising, the unfolding that lingers.” He describes this experience with the Greek words phusis (emerging dominance) and alêtheia (unconcealment). He attempts to show that the early Greeks did not “objectify” beings (they did not try to reduce them to an object for the thinking subject), but they let them be as they were, as self-showing rising into unconcealment. They experienced the phenomenality of what is present, its radiant self-showing. The departure of Western philosophical tradition from concern with what is present in presencing, from this unique experience that astonished the Greeks, has had profound theoretical and practical consequences.

According to Heidegger, the experience of what is present in presencing signifies the true, unmediated experience of “the things themselves” (die Sache selbst). We may recall that the call to “the things themselves” was included in the Husserlian program of phenomenology. By means of phenomenological description Husserl attempted to arrive at pure phenomena and to describe beings just as they were given independently of any presuppositions. For Heidegger, this attempt has, however, a serious drawback. Like the tradition of modern philosophy preceding him, Husserl stood at the ground of subjectivity. The transcendental subjectivity or consciousness was for him “the sole absolute being.” It was the presupposition that had not been accounted for in his program which aimed to be presuppositionless. Consequently, in Heidegger’s view, the Husserlian attempt to arrive at pure, unmediated phenomena fails. Husserl’s phenomenology departs from the original phenomenality of beings and represents them in terms of the thinking subject as their presupposed ground. By contrast, Heidegger argues, for the Presocratics, beings are grounded in being as presencing. Being, however, is not a ground. To the early Greeks, being, unlimited in its dis-closure, appears as an abyss, the source of thought and wonder. Being calls everything into question, casts the human being out of any habitual ground, and opens before him the mystery of existence.

The departure of western philosophical tradition from what is present in presencing results in metaphysics. Heidegger believes that today’s metaphysics, in the form of technology and the calculative thinking related to it, has become so pervasive that there is no realm of life that is not subject to its dominance. It imposes its technological-scientific-industrial character on human beings, making it the sole criterion of the human sojourn on earth. As it ultimately degenerates into ideologies and worldviews, metaphysics provides an answer to the question of the being of beings for contemporary men and women, but skillfully removes from their lives the problem of their own existence. Moreover, because its sway over contemporary human beings is so powerful, metaphysics cannot be simply cast aside or rejected. Any direct attempt to do so will only strengthen its hold. Metaphysics cannot be rejected, canceled or denied, but it can be overcome by demonstrating its nihilism. In Heidegger’s use of the term, “nihilism” has a very specific meaning. It refers to the forgetfulness of being. What remains unquestioned and forgotten in metaphysics is Being; hence, it is nihilistic.

According to Heidegger, Western humankind in all its relations with beings is sustained by metaphysics. Every age, every human epoch, no matter however different they may be—

Greece after the Presocratics, Rome, the Middle Ages, modernity—has asserted a metaphysics and, therefore, is placed in a specific relationship to what-is as a whole. Metaphysics inquires about the being of beings, but it reduces being to a being; it does not think of being as being. Insofar as being itself is obliterated in it, metaphysics is nihilism. The metaphysics of Plato is no less nihilistic than that of Nietzsche. Consequently, Heidegger tries to demonstrate the nihilism of metaphysics in his account of the history of being, which he considers as the history of being’s oblivion. His attempt to overcome metaphysics is not based on a common-sense positing of a different set of values or the setting out of an alternative worldview, but rather is related to his concept of history, the central theme of which is the repetition of the possibilities for existence. This repetition consists in thinking being back to the primordial beginning of the West—to the early Greek experience of being as presencing—and repeating this beginning, so that the Western world can begin anew.

6. From the First Beginning to the New Beginning

Many scholars perceive something unique in the Greek beginning of philosophy. It is commonly acknowledged that Thales and his successors asked generalized questions concerning what is as a whole, and proposed general, rational answers which were no longer based on a theological ground. However, Heidegger does not associate the unique beginning with the alleged discovery of rationality and science. In fact, he claims that both rationality and science are later developments, so that they cannot apply to Presocratic thought. In his view, the Presocratics ask: “What are beings as such as a whole?” and they answer: aletheia—unconcealment. They experience beings in their phenomenality: as what is present in presencing. But the later thought which begins with Plato and Aristotle is unable to keep up with the beginning. With Plato and Aristotle metaphysics begins and the history of being’s oblivion originates.

The aim which the later Heidegger sets before himself is precisely to return to the original experience of beings in being that stands at the beginning of Western thought. This unmediated experience of beings in their phenomenality can be variously described: what is present in presencing, the unconcealment of what is present, the original disclosure of beings. To repeat the primordial beginning more originally in its originality means to bring us back to the Presocratic experiences, to dis-close them, and to let them be as they originally are. But the repetition is not for the sake of the Presocratics themselves. Heidegger’s work is not a mere antiquarian, scholarly study of early Greek thinking, nor is it an affirmation of the long lost Greek way of life. It occurs within the perspective of nihilism and being’s forgetfulness, both unknown to the Greeks, and has as a goal the future possibilities for existence. It happens as the listening that opens itself out to the words of the Presocratics from our contemporary age, from the age of the world picture and representation, the world which is marked by the domination of technology and the oblivion of being. In the first beginning, the task of the Greeks was to ask the question “What are beings?,” and hence to bring beings as such as a whole to the first recognition and the most simple interpretation. In the end, the task is to make questionable what at the end of a long tradition of philosophy-metaphysics has been forgotten. The new beginning begins thus with the question of being.

From Being and Time (1927) where the question of the meaning of being is first developed, but still expressed in the language of metaphysics, to “Time and Being” (1962) where an attempt to think being without regard to metaphysics is made, Heidegger goes full circle. Heidegger begins by asking about the multiple meanings of being and ends up conceding its multiplicity and acknowledging that there are multiple determinations or meanings of being in which being discloses itself in history. Nevertheless, in neither of these meanings does being give itself fully. “As it discloses itself in beings, being withdraws.” There is an essential withdrawal of being. Therefore, the truth of being is none of its particular historical determinations—idea, substantia, actualitas, objectivity or the will to power. The truth of being can be defined as the openness, the free region which always out of sight provides the space of play for the different determinations of being and human epochs established in them. It is that which is before actual things and grants them a possibility of manifestation as what is present, ens creatum, and objects.

The truth of being, its openness, is for Heidegger not something which we can merely consider or think of. It is not our own production. It is where we always come to stand. We find ourselves thrown in a historically conditioned environment, in an epoch in which the decision concerning the prevailing interpretation of the being of being is already made for us. Yet, by asking the question of being, we can at least attempt to free ourselves from our historical conditioning. Heidegger’s program expressed in “The End of Philosophy and the Task of Thinking” (1964) consists solely in the character of thinking which does not attempt to dominate, but engages in disclosing and opening up what shows itself, emerges, and is manifest. When Heidegger urges us to stand in being, he does not merely ask us to acknowledge our own place in being’s history, but to be future-oriented and see the future in a unity with the past as having-been and the present. It means turning oneself into being in its disclosing withdrawal.

7. From Philosophy to Political Theory

Heidegger never claimed that his philosophy was concerned with politics. Nevertheless, there are certainly some political implications of his thought. He perceives the metaphysical culture of the West as a continuity. It begins with Plato and ends with modernity, and the dominance of science and technology. He thus implies in the post-modernist fashion that Nazism and the atom bomb, Auschwitz and Hiroshima, have been something like the “fulfillment” of the tradition of Western metaphysics and tries to distance himself from that tradition. He turns to the Presocratics in order to retrieve a pre-metaphysical mode of thought that would serve as a starting point for a new beginning. However, his grand vision of the essential history of the West and of western nihilism can be questioned. Modernity, whose development involves not only a technological but also a social revolution, which sets individuals loose from religious and ethnic communities, from parishes and family bonds, and which affirms materialistic values, can be regarded as a radical departure from earlier classical and Christian traditions. Contrary to Heidegger’s argument, rather than being a mere continuity, the “essential” history of the West can then be seen as a history of radical transformations. Christianity challenges the classical world, while assimilating some aspects of it, and is in turn challenged by modernity. Modernity overturns the ideas and values of the traditional (Christian and classical) culture of the West, and, once it becomes global, leads to the erosion of nonwestern traditional cultures.

Under the cover of immense speculative depth and rich ontological vocabulary full of intricate wordplay (both which make his writings extremely hard to follow) Heidegger expresses a simple political vision. He is a revolutionary thinker who denies the traditional philosophical division between theory and practice, and this is especially clear when he boldly declares in his Introduction to Metaphysics that “we have undertaken the great and lengthy task of demolishing a world that has grown old and of building it truly anew”. He wants to overturn the traditional culture of the West and build it anew on the basis of earlier traditions in the name of being. Like other thinkers of modernity, he adopts a Eurocentric perspective and sees the revival of German society as a condition for the revival of Europe (or the West), and that of Europe as a condition for the revival of for the whole world; like them, while rejecting God as an end, he attempts to set up fabricated ends for human beings. Ultimately, in the famous interview with Der Spiegel, he expresses his disillusionment with his project and says: “Philosophy will not be able to bring about a direct change of the present state of the world . . . The greatness of what is to be thought is too great.” Like being, which he describes as “disclosing self-concealing,” after making a disclosure he withdraws; after stirring up a revolution, he leaves all its problems to others. He says: “only a God can still save us,” but the God for whom, in the absence of philosophical thought, he now looks is clearly not that of the Christians or of any contemporary religion.

In the Spiegel interview Heidegger tells us that in order to begin anew, we need to go to the “age-old” (i.e., pre-classical and pre-metaphysical) traditions of thought. He invokes the concept of the ancient polis. Yet, since he does not want to concern himself with the question of ethics (beyond saying in the “Letter of Humanism” that the word “ethics appeared for the first time in the school of Plato” and thus implying that ethics does not think the truth of being and is nihilistic), he does not consider the fact that even in pre-Platonic and pre-Socratic times a Greek polis was an ethical community, in which moral questions were raised and discussed. The Iliad and Odyssey of Homer, the poems of Hesiod, and the tragedies of Sophocles, as well as the other ancient Greek texts, including the monumental political work of Thucydides, the History of the Peloponnesian War, express concerns with ethical behavior at both the individual and community levels. Furthermore, the strength of Western civilization, insofar as its roots can be traced to ancient Greece, is that from its beginning it was based on rationality, understood as free debate, and the affirmation of fundamental moral values. Whenever it turned to irrationality and moral relativism, as in Nazism and Communism, that civilization was in decline. Therefore, Heidegger is likely to be mistaken in his diagnosis of the ills of the contemporary society, and his solution to those ills seems to be wrong. Asking the question of being (and, drawing our attention to this question is certainly his significant contribution) is an important addition to, but never a replacement for asking moral questions in the spirit of rationality and freedom.

Heidegger claims that the human being as Da-sein can be understood as the “there” (Da) which being (Sein) requires in order to disclose itself. The human being is the unique being whose being has the character of openness toward Being. But men and women can also turn away from being, forget their true selves, and thus deprive themselves of their humanity. This is, in Heidegger’s view, the situation of contemporary humans, who have replaced authentic questioning concerning their existence with ready-made answers served up by ideologies, the mass media, and overwhelming technology. Consequently, Heidegger attempts to bring today’s men and women back to the question of being. At the beginning of the tradition of Western philosophy, the human being was defined as animal rationale, the animal endowed with reason. Since then, reason has become an absolute value which through education brings about a gradual transformation of all spheres of human life. It is not more reason in the modern sense of calculative thinking, Heidegger believes, that we need today, but more openness toward and more reflection on that which is nearest to us—being.

8. Heidegger's Collected Works

Heidegger’s earlier publications and transcripts of his lectures are being brought out in Gesamtausgabe, the complete edition of his works. The Gesamtausgabe, which is not yet complete and projected to fill about one hundred volumes, is published by Vittorio Klostermann, Frankfurt am Main. The series consists of four divisions: (I) Published Writings 1910-1976; (II) Lectures from Marburg and Freiburg, 1919-1944; (III) Private Monographs and Lectures, 1919-1967; (IV) Notes and Fragments. Below there is a list of the collected works of Martin Heidegger. English translations and publishers are cited with each work translated into English.

a. Published Writings, 1910-1976

  • Frühe Schriften (1912-16).
  • Sein und Zeit (1927). Translated as Being and Time by John Macquarrie and Edward Robinson (Oxford: Basil Blackwell, 1978).
  • Kant und das Problem der Metaphysik (1929). Translated as Kant and the Problem of Metaphysics, by Richard Taft (Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1997).
  • Erläuterungen zu Hölderlins Dichtung (1936-68). Translated as Elucidations of Hölderlin's Poetry, by Keith Hoeller (Amherst, New York: Humanity Books, 2000).
  • Holzwege (1935-46).
    • Der Ursprung der Kunstwerkes.” Translated as “The Origin of the Work of Art,” by Albert Hofstadter, in Poetry, Language, Thought (New York: Harper & Row, 1971), and in Basic Writings (New York: Harper & Row, 1977, 1993).
    • Die Zeit des Weltbildes.” Translated as “The Age of the World Picture” by William Lovitt in The Question Concerning Technology and Other Essays (NewYork: Harper & Row, 1977).
    • Hegels Begriff der Erfahrung.”
    • Nietzsches Wort 'Gott ist tot'.” Translated as “The Word of Nietzsche: ‘God Is Dead’” by William Lovitt in The Question Concerning Technology and Other Essays.
    • Wozu Dichter?.” Translated as “What Are Poets For?” by Albert Hofstadter, in Poetry, Language, Thought.
    • Der Spruch der Anaximander.” Translated as “The Anaximander Fragment” by David F. Krell and Frank A. Capuzzi in Early Greek Thinking (New York: Harper & Row, 1975).
  • Vol. I, Nietzsche I (1936-39). Translated as Nietzsche I: The Will to Power as Art by David F. Krell (New York: Harper & Row, 1979)
  • Vol. II, Nietzsche II (1939-46). Translated as “The Eternal Recurrence of the Same” by David F. Krell in Nietzsche II: The Eternal Recurrence of the Same (New York, Harper & Row, 1984).
  • Vorträge und Aufsätze (1936-53).
    • Die Frage nach der Technik.” Translated as “The Question Concerning Technology” by William Lovitt in The Question Concerning Technology and Other Essays.
    • Wissenschaft und Besinnung.” Translated as “Science and Reflection” by William Lovitt in The Question Concerning Technology and Other Essays.
    • Überwindung der Metaphysik.” Translated as “Overcoming Metaphysics” by Joan Stambaugh in The End of Philosophy (New York: Harper & Row, 1973).
    • Wer ist Nietzsches Zarathustra.” Translated as “Who is Nietzsche’s Zarathustra?” by David F. Krell in Nietzsche II: The Eternal Recurrence of the Same.
    • Bauen Wohnen Denken.” Translated as “Building Dwelling Thinking.”
    • Das Ding.” Translated as “The Thing” by Albert Hofstadter, in Poetry, Language, Thought.
    • ...dichterisch wohnet der Mensch...” Translated as “...Poetically Man Dwells...” by Albert Hofstadter, in Poetry, Language, Thought.
    • Logos.” Translated as “Logos (Heraclitus, Fragment B 50)” by David F. Krell and Frank A. Capuzzi in Early Greek Thinking.
    • Moira.” Translated as “Moira (Parmenides VIII, 34-41)” by David F. Krell and Frank A. Capuzzi in Early Greek Thinking.
    • Aletheia.” Translated as “Aletheia (Heraclius, Fragment B 16)” by David F. Krell and Frank A. Capuzzi in Early Greek Thinking.
  • Was heisst Denken? (1951-52). Translated as What Is Called Thinking? by Fred D. Wieck and J. Glenn Gray (New York: Harper & Row, 1968).
  • Wegmarken (1919-58). Translated as Pathmarks. Edited by William McNeill (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1998).
    • Contains: “Comments on Karl Jaspers’ Psychology of Worldviews” (1919/21), “Phenomenology and Theology” (1927), “From the Last Marburg Lecture Course” (1928), “What is Metaphysics?” (1929), “On the Essence of Ground” (1929), “On the Essence of Truth” (1930), “Plato’s Doctrine of Truth” (1931-1932, 1940), “On the Essence and Concept in Aristotle's Physics B 1” (1939), “Postscript to ‘What is Metaphysics?’” (1943); “Letter on Humanism” (1946), “Introduction to ‘What is Metaphysics?’” (1949), “On the Question of Being” (1955), “Hegel and the Greeks” (1958), “Kant’s Thesis About Being” (1961).
  • Der Satz vom Grund (1955-56). Translated as The Principle of Reason by Reginald Lilly (Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1991).
  • Identität und Differenz (1955-57). Translated as Identity and Difference by Joan Stambaugh (New York: Harper & Row, 1969).
  • Unterwegs zur Sprache (1950-59). Translated as On the Way to Language by Peter D. Hertz (New York: Harper & Row, 1971).
  • Aus der Erfahrung des Denkens (1910-76).
  • Zur Sache des Denkens (1962-64). Translated as On Time and Being by Joan Stambaugh (New York: Harper & Row, 1972). Contains: “Time and Being,” “The End of Philosophy and the Task of Thinking,” and “My Way to Phenomenology.”
  • Seminare (1951-73).
  • Reden und andere Zeugnisse eines Lebensweges (1910-1976).

b. Lectures from Marburg and Freiburg, 1919-1944

  • Der Beginn der neuzeitlichen Philosophie (winter semester, 1923-1924).
  • Aristoteles: Rhetorik (summer semester, 1924).
  • Platon: Sophistes (winter semester, 1924-1925). Translated as Plato's Sophist by Richard Rojcewicz and Andre Schuwer (Bloomington, Indiana University Press, 1997).
  • Prolegomena zur Geschite des Zeitbegriffs (summer semester, 1925). Translated as History of the Concept of Time by Theodore Kisiel (Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1985).
  • Logik: Die frage nach der Wahrheit (winter semester 1925-1926).
  • Grundbegriffe der antiken Philosophie (summer semester 1926).
  • Geschichte der Philosophie von Thomas v. Aquin bis Kant (winter semester 1926-1927).
  • Die Grundprobleme der Phänomenologie (summer semester 1927). Translated as The Basic Problems of Phenomonology by Albert Hofstadter (Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1982).
  • Phänomenologie Interpretation von Kants Kritik der reinen Vernunft (winter semester 1927-1928). Translated as Phenomenological Interpretations of Kant's Critique of Pure Reason by Parvis Emad and Kenneth Maly (Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1997).
  • Metaphysische Anfangsgründe der Logik im Ausgang von Leibniz (summer semester, 1928). Translated as The Metaphysical Foundations of Logic by Michael Heim (Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1984).
  • Einleitung in die Philosophie (winter semester 1928-1929).
  • Der Deutsche Idealismus (Fichte, Hegel, Schelling) und die philosophische Problemlage der Gegenwart (summer semester, 1929).
  • Die Grundbegriffe der Metaphysik: Welt-Endlichkeit-Einsamkeit (winter semester, 1929-1930). Translated as The Fundamental Concepts of Metaphysics by William McNeill and Nicholas Walker (Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1995).
  • Vom Wesen der menschlichen Freiheit. Einleitung in die Philosophie (summer semester, 1930).
  • Hegels Phänomenologie des Geistes (winter semester, 1930-1931). Translated as Hegel's Phenomenology of Spirit by Parvis Emad and Kenneth Maly (Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1988).
  • Aristoteles: Metaphysik IX (summer semester, 1931). Translated as Aristotle's Metaphysics Theta 1-3 On the Essence and Actuality of Force by Walter Brogan and Peter Warnek (Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1995).
  • Vom Wesen der Wahrheit. Zu Platons Höhlengleichnis und Theätet (winter semester, 1931-1932).
  • Der Anfang der abendländischen Philosophie (Anaximander und Parmenides) (summer semester, 1932).
  • Sein und Wahrheit (winter semester, 1933-1934).
  • Logik als die Frage nach dem Wesen der Sprache (summer semester, 1934).
  • Hölderlins Hymnen "Germanien" und "Der Rhein" (winter semester, 1934-1935).
  • Einführung in die Metaphysik (summer semester, 1935). Translated as An Introduction to Metaphysics by Gregory Fried and Richard Polt (New Haven, Conn.: Yale University Press, 2000).
  • Die Frage nach dem Ding. Zu Kants Lehre von den transzendentalen Grundsätzen. (winter semester, 1935-1936). Translated as What Is a Thing by W. B. Barton, Jr. and Vera Deutsch, (Chicago: Henry Regnery Company, 1967).
  • Schelling: Vom Wesen der menschlichen Freiheit (1809) (summer semester, 1936). Translated as Schelling's Treatise on the Essence of Human Freedom by Joan Stambaugh, (Athens: Ohio University Press, 1984).
  • Nietzsche: Der Wille zur Macht als Kunst (winter semester, 1936-1937). Translated as Nietzsche I: The Will to Power as Art by David F. Krell (New York, Harper & Row, 1979).
  • Nietzsches Metaphysische Grundstellung im abendländischen Denken: Die ewige Wiederkehr des Gleichen (summer semester, 1937). Translated as “The Eternal Recurrence of the Same” in Nietzsche II: The Eternal Recurrence of the Same by David F. Krell (New York: Harper & Row, 1984).
  • Grundfragen der Philosophie. Ausgewählte "Probleme" der "Logik" (winter semester, 1937-1938). Translated as Basic Questions of Philosophy by Albert Hofstadter (Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1982).
  • Nietzsches II. Unzeitgemässe Betrachtung (winter semester, 1938-1939).
  • Nietzsches Lehre vom Willen zur Macht als Erkenntnis (summer semester, 1939). Translated as "The Will to Power as Knowledge" in Nietzsche III: The Will to Power as Knowledge and Metaphysics by Joan Stambaugh (New York, Harper & Row, 1987).
  • Nietzsche: Der europäische Nihilismus (second trimester, 1940).
  • Die Metaphysik des deutschen Idealismus. Zur erneuten auslegung von Schelling: Philosophische untersuchungen ueber das Wesen der menschlichen Freiheit und die damit zusammenhaengenden Gegenstaende (1809) (first trimester, 1941).
  • Nietzsches Metaphysik (1941-2). Einleitung in die Philosopie - Denken und Dichten (1944-5).
  • Grundbegriffe (summer semester, 1941). Translated as Basic Concepts by Gary Aylesworth (Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1993).
  • Hölderlins Hymne "Andenken" (winter semester, 1941-1942).
  • Hölderlins Hymne "Der Ister" (summer semester, 1942). Translated as Hölderlin's Hymn "The Ister" by William McNeill and Julia Davis (Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1996).
  • Parmenides (winter semester, 1942-1943). Translated as Parmenides by Andre Schuwer and Richard Rojcewicz (Bloomington, Indiana University Press, 1992).
  • Heraklit. 1. Der Anfang des abendländischen Denkens (Heraklit). (summer semester, 1943); 2. Logik. Heraklits Lehre vom Logos (summer semester, 1944).
  • Zur Bestimmung der Philosophie (1919).
  • Grundprobleme der Phänomenologie (winter semester, 1919-1920).
  • Phaenomenologie der Anschauung und des Ausdrucks. Theorie der philosophischen Begriffsbildung (summer semester, 1920).
  • Phänomenologie des religiösen Lebens (summer semester, 1921).
  • Phänomenologische Interpretationen zu Aristoteles: Einführung in die phänomeno-logische Forschung (winter semester, 1921-1922).
  • Phänomenologische Interpretationen ausgewählter Abhandlungen des Aristoteles zur Ontologie und Logik. (summer semester, 1922).
  • Ontologie: Hermeneutik der Faktizität (summer semester, 1923). Translated as Ontology: The Hermeneutics of Facticity by John va Buren (Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1999).

c. Private Monographs and Lectures, 1919-1967

  • Der Begriff der Zeit (1924). Translated as The Concept of Time by William McNeill, (Oxford: Blackwell, 1992).
  • Beiträge zur Philosophie (Vom Ereignis) (1936-1938). Translated as Contributions to Philosophy: (From Enowning) by Parvis Emad and Kenneth Maly (Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1999).
  • Besinnung.
  • Metaphysik und Nihilismus. Die Überwindung derMetaphysik. Das Wesen des Nihilismus.
  • Hegel. Die Negativität. Eine Auseinandersetzung mit Hegel aus dem Ansatz in der Negativität (1938-1939, 1941). 2 Erläuterung der "Einleitung" zu Hegels "Phänomenologie des Geistes" (1942).
  • Die Geschichte des Seyns (1938-1940).
  • Das Ereignis (1941)
  • Wahrheitsfrage als Vorfrage. Die Aletheia: Die Erinnerung in den ersten Anfang; Entmachtung der Ousis (1937).
  • Zu Hölderlin - Griechenlandreisen.
  • Feldweg-Gespräche. (1944-1945)
  • Bremer und Freiburger Vortraege.
  • Vorträge Vom Wesen der Wahrheit Freiburg lecture (1930). Der Ursprung der Kunstwerkes (1935).
  • Gedachtes.
  • Anmerkungen zu "Vom Wesen des Grundes" (1936). Eine Auseinandersetzung mit "Sein und Zeit" (1936). Laufende Anmerkungen zu Sein und Zeit (1936).
  • Marburger Übungen. Auslegungen der Aristotelischen "physik".
  • Leibniz-Übungen.

d. Notes and Fragments

  • Vom Wesen der Sprache
  • Übungen SS 1937. Neitzsches metaphysische Grundstellung. Sein und Schein (1937)
  • Einübung in das Denken. Die metaphysischen Grundstellungen des abendländischen Denkens. Die Bedrohung der Wissenschaft.
  • Überlegungen II-VI.
  • Überlegungen VII-XI.
  • Überlegungen XII-XV.

Author Information

W. J. Korab-Karpowicz
Anglo-American University of Prague
Czech Republic

Xenophanes (c. 570—c. 478 B.C.E.)

xenophanesXenophanes of Colophon was a traveling poet and sage with philosophical leanings who lived in ancient Greece during the sixth and the beginning of the fifth centuries B.C.E. There are a significant number of surviving fragments for such an early figure, and the poetic verses available to us indicate a broad range of issues. These include comments on religion, knowledge, the natural world, the proper comportment at a banquet, as well as other social teachings and commentary.

Despite his varying interests, he is most commonly remembered for his critiques of popular religion, particularly false conceptions of the divine that are a byproduct of the human propensity to anthropomorphize deities. According to Xenophanes, humans have been severely mislead by this tendency, as well as the scriptures of the day, and he seemed intent on leading his audience toward a perspective on religion that is based more on rationality and less on traditionally held beliefs.  His theological contributions were not merely negative, however, for he also presented comments that support the notion of divine goodness, and many have speculated that he may have been the first monotheist, or even pantheist, in the Western intellectual tradition. The possibility that Xenophanes endorsed the perspective of divine unity led Plato and Aristotle to designate him as the founder of the Eleatic school of philosophy, and some have classified him (though probably erroneously) as having been Parmenides’ teacher.

Many of Xenophanes’ poetic lines are concerned with the physical world and the fragments show some very inventive attempts to demythologize various heavenly phenomena. An example of this is his claim that a rainbow is nothing but a cloud. He also postulated that earth and water are the fundamental “stuffs” of nature and, based in part on his observations of fossils, he held the view that our world has gone through alternating periods of extreme wetness and dryness.

Another area in which Xenophanes made some seminal comments is epistemology. In addition to endorsing a critical rationality toward religious claims, he encouraged a general humility and skepticism toward all knowledge claims and he attempted to discourage dogmatic arrogance.

Table of Contents

  1. Life, Works and Significance
  2. Social Commentary and Criticism
  3. Religious Views
    1. Critique of Greek Religion
    2. Divine Goodness
    3. The Nature of the Divine
      1. Was Xenophanes a Monotheist?
      2. Was Xenophanes an Immaterialist?
      3. Was Xenophanes a Pantheist?
  4. Natural and Scientific Views
    1. Earth and Water as Fundamental
    2. Demythologizing Heavenly Phenomena
  5. Critique of Knowledge
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Life, Works and Significance

Xenophanes was from a small town of Colophon in Ionia and most recent scholars place the date of his birth sometime around 570-560 B.C.E. He appeared to live into his nineties, thereby placing his death sometime after 478 B.C.E. This is indicated by the following lines from one of Xenophanes’ remaining fragments, which shows him to still be writing poetry at ninety-two years of age:

Already there are seven and sixty years
tossing about my counsel throughout the land of Greece,
and from my birth up till then there were twenty and five to add to these,
if I know how to speak truly concerning these things. (frag. 8)

He seems to have left his home at an early age and spent much of his life wandering around Greece, often reciting his poetry at the appropriate functions and gatherings.

There are 45 remaining fragments of Xenophanes’ poetry and testimonia about Xenophanes that have been collected from a wide range of sources. The fragments are in the form of poetic verse, primarily in hexameters and elegiac meter. A few ancient authors contend that Xenophanes also wrote a treatise entitled, “On Nature,” but such sources do not appear to be credible. Nonetheless, the existing fragments comprise a rather significant collection of work for an early Greek philosopher. In fact, Xenophanes is the first Pre-Socratic philosopher for whom we have a significant amount of preserved text. While this amount of material has been helpful in determining the various themes and concerns of Xenophanes, there are still wide ranging opinions on the fundamental tenets of his philosophy. “Perhaps the greatest impediment to a consistent understanding of Xenophanes’ philosophy,” states J.H. Lesher, “is the frequent disparity between the opinions he expressed in his poems and those attributed to him in the testimonia.” (7)

There is some debate as to whether Xenophanes ought to be included in the philosophical canon and it is the case that in some surveys of ancient Greek or Pre-Socratic philosophy, Xenophanes is left out altogether. Many scholars have classified him as basically a poet or a theologian, or even an irrational mystic. There are several issues working against Xenophanes in this regard. He apparently did not attract a large number of followers or disciples to his philosophy. He was not treated particularly favorably by Plato or Aristotle. Plus, given the poetical and polemical nature of the various fragments, it is also true that Xenophanes did not leave us with anything resembling a rational justification or argument for some of his claims, which is the sort of thing one would expect from a philosopher, no matter how early. Nonetheless, to disregard Xenophanes as a serious philosophical figure would be shortsighted. He did leave us with some rather seminal and interesting contributions to the history of thought. While it is true that Xenophanes may not fit into any precise mold or pattern of justification which would classify him as a philosopher of note, the man and his fragments are deserving of serious philosophical consideration.

2. Social Commentary and Criticism

Much like Socrates, the “gadfly of Athens,” whom he preceded by over one hundred years, one picture of Xenophanes that emerges in several of the fragments is that of social critic. Much of Xenophanes’ verse was likely intended for performance at social gatherings and functions as he “tossed about, bearing [him]self from city to city”  (frag 45). In fragment 1 we find a detailed account of a feast that ends with a call to proper behavior.

And having poured a libation and prayed to be able to do
what is right—for these are obvious—
it is not wrong to drink as much as allows any but an aged man
to reach his home without a servants aid.
Praise the man who when he has taken drink brings noble deeds to light,
As memory and a striving for virtue bring to him.

This suggests that while he was welcome among circles of people who had access to the finer things in life he also felt it his duty to encourage them to comport themselves with piety and moderation. Elsewhere, we find Xenophanes implying a connection between the downfall of his hometown with her citizen’s ostentatious displays of wealth (frag 3). In another of the lengthy surviving fragments, we find a critique of cultural priorities that like minds have echoed throughout history. Here Xenophanes bemoans the rewards and reverence afforded champion athletes while the expertise of the learned and the poets goes unheeded and unappreciated.

For our expertise is better than the strength of men and horses.
But this practice makes no sense nor is it right
to prefer strength to this good expertise.
For neither if there were a good boxer among the people
nor if there were a pentathlete or wrestler
nor again if there were someone swift afoot—
which is most honoured of all men’s deeds of strength—
would for this reason a city be better governed.
Small joy would a city have from this—
If someone were to be victorious in competing for a prize on Pisa’s banks—
For these do not enrich a city’s treasure room. (frag. 2)

3. Religious Views

a. Critique of Greek Religion

Xenophanes is the first Greek figure that we know of to provide a set of theological assertions and he is perhaps best remembered for his critique of Greek popular religion, specifically the tendency to anthropomorphize deities. In rather bold fashion, Xenophanes takes to task the scripture of his day for rendering the gods in such a negative and erroneous light.

Homer and Hesiod have attributed to the gods
all sorts of things which are matters of reproach and censure among men:
theft, adultery and mutual deceit. (frag. 11)

This line of criticism against the primary teachers of Greece clearly resonated with Socrates and Plato where Xenophanes’ influence can especially be seen in the Euthyphro and book two of the Republic. In another set of passages, which are probably the most commonly cited of Xenophanes’ fragments, we find a series of argumentatively styled passages against the human propensity to create gods in our own image:

But mortals suppose that gods are born,
wear their own clothes and have a voice and body. (frag. 14)
Ethiopians say that their gods are snub-nosed and black;
Thracians that theirs are blue-eyed and red-haired. (frag. 16)
But if horses or oxen or lions had hands
or could draw with their hands and accomplish such works as men,
horses would draw the figures of the gods as similar to horses, and the oxen as similar to oxen,
and they would make the bodies
of the sort which each of them had. (frag. 15)

While Xenophanes is obviously targeting our predisposition to anthropomorphize here, he is also being critical of the tendency of religiously-minded people to privilege their own belief systems over others for no sound reasons. This would have been particularly true of the Greeks of Xenophanes’ time who considered their religious views superior to those of barbarians. As Richard McKirihan notes, when held up to the critical light of reason, “Greek, ‘barbarian’, and hypothetical bovine views of the gods are put on an even footing and cancel each other out, leaving no grounds to prefer one over the others. This brings them all equally into question.” (74) This does not imply that Xenophanes considered all religious views to be equivalent, but rather it seems to indicate that he is concerned with leading his Greek audience toward a perspective on religion that is based more on rationality and less on traditionally held beliefs. So then, what would a more rational perspective on religion entail? Here Xenophanes offers up a number of theological insights, both negative and positive.

b. Divine Goodness

As we have seen in fragment 11, Xenophanes upheld the notion that immorality cannot be associated with a deity. But while Xenophanes is clearly against the portrayals of the Olympian gods performing illicit deeds, it is less clear as to why he would maintain such a thesis. There are two possible readings of this. One could first say that, given Xenophanes critique of anthropomorphizing that is discussed above, he believes that it would make no sense to ascribe to the gods any sort of human behaviors or characteristics, be they illicit or praiseworthy. On this reading, Xenophanes should be seen as a type of mystic. Another interpretation, which is more likely, is that Xenophanes upheld the notion of divine perfection and goodness. It is true that Xenophanes never explicitly states such a position.  However, as Lesher points out, such a thesis is attributed to him by Simplicius, and the belief in the inherent goodness of the gods or god was a widely shared conviction among many Greek philosophers. (84) Furthermore, such an interpretation would square with Xenophanes’ assertion that it is “good always to hold the gods in high regard.” (frag. 1)

c. The Nature of the Divine

While it seems clear that Xenophanes advocated the moral goodness of the divine, some of his other theological assertions are more difficult to discern. There have been a rather wide range of arguments by scholars that commit Xenophanes to any number of theological positions. Some scholars have maintained that he was the first Greek philosopher to advocate monotheism while others have argued that Xenophanes was clearly supporting Olympian polytheism. Some have attributed pantheism to Xenophanes while others have maintained that he is essentially an atheist or materialist. Given such a wide discrepancy, it will perhaps be helpful to first list the fundamental fragments and then move on to the possible specifics of Xenophanes’ theology.

One god is greatest among gods and men,
Not at all like mortals in body or in thought. (frag. 23)
…whole he sees, whole he thinks, and whole he hears. (frag. 24)
…but completely without toil he shakes all things by the thought of his mind. (frag. 25)
…always he abides in the same place, not moving at all,
nor is it seemly for him to travel to different places at different times. (frag. 26)

i. Was Xenophanes a Monotheist?

At first glance, the opening line of fragment 23 could be read as a pronouncement of monotheism and a rejection of Greek polytheism. If so, Xenophanes would have been the first Greek thinker to espouse such a revolutionary theological perspective. While the phrasing “one god greatest among gods” [emphasis mine] would seem to contradict monotheism on the face of it, scholars from both sides of the debate recognize that this is not an endorsement of polytheism by Xenophanes. Rather it should be seen as a “polar expression,” which is a poetic device used to emphasize a point and does not imply the existence of things at either pole. Nor should the fact that Xenophanes utilizes the term “gods” throughout the available fragments be seen as an endorsement of polytheism in and of itself. It is highly likely that Xenophanes is simply utilizing the common vernacular to speak of the divine. So the question remains, was Xenophanes a monotheist?

A great number of traditional and modern sources have attributed monotheism to Xenophanes and fragments 23-26 would seem to indicate the potential merit of such an assumption. Some have gone as far as to say that not only was he the first monotheist, but he was also the first to advocate a radical form of monotheism which insists that the one god is pure spirit and is completely distinct from the world. In recent years, the staunchest advocate of the monotheistic interpretation has been Jonathan Barnes who extends Xenophanes’ rationalistic critique of religion to its natural end: “Xenophanes, I conclude, was a monotheist, as the long tradition has it; and he was an a priori monotheist; like later Christian theologians, he argued on purely logical grounds that there could not be a plurality of gods.” (92) Given such an interpretation, Barnes maintains that the enigmatic opening line of fragment 23 should be paraphrased to read, “There is one god, since (by definition) a god is greater than anything else, whether god or man.” (92) Other scholars have ascribed a softer form of monotheism to Xenophanes, maintaining that while he does not seem to completely abandon polytheism explicitly, he does so implicitly.

While the designation of Xenophanes as a monotheist is warranted in many respects, such an interpretation ultimately presumes too much. Given the fact that monotheism would have been a radical departure from traditional Greek beliefs, we would assume that Xenophanes would have taken more pains to differentiate and clarify his viewpoint. For one thing, it is highly suspicious that, while he takes Homer and Hesiod to task for their portrayal of the nature of the gods, he never bothers to comment on the number of their gods. Furthermore, a true monotheist would not likely be so cavalier about his use of the plural ‘gods’ in a polythesitic society. It is likely that later commentators and scholars have been somewhat biased in their attempts to find in Xenophanes the early articulations of a now commonly held religious perspective. Guthrie puts the matter in perspective: “…it must be understood that the question of monotheism or polytheism, which is of vital religious importance to the Christian, Jew or Muslim, never had the same prominence in the Greek mind.” (375) As such, the best summary of the complexity of the monotheistic question is presented to us by Lesher: “The fragments warrant attributing to Xenophanes the novel idea of a single god of unusual power, consciousness, and cosmic influence, but not the stronger view that beyond this one god there could be nothing else worthy of the name.” (99)

ii. Was Xenophanes an Immaterialist?

In the second line of fragment 23, Xenophanes declares that god is unlike mortals “in body and thought.” Although some of the ancient testimonia have interpreted this to mean that god lacks a body, this should not be read as an attempt by Xenophanes to put forth the claim that the divine is incorporeal, for it would be some time before the concept of an existing thing that is completely immaterial would develop. As McKirahan, notes, “the fifth-century atomists were the first presocratics clearly to conceive of an immaterial, noncorporeal existing thing, and this idea came only with difficulty.” (63) Rather than reading these lines as an expression of the incorporeal nature of the divine, these passages should be interpreted as a continuation of Xenophanes’ efforts to correct the mistaken conceptions of divine nature that have been passed on from Homer and Hesiod. In fragment 25, for example, Xenophanes introduces a god who effortlessly, “shakes all things by the thought of his mind.” Readers or hearers of this passage would immediately recognize Xenophanes’ dramatic corollary to a famous portrayal of Zeus in the Illiad who simply shakes his head to display his will and power. By contrast, a truly supreme god exerts will and power without any toil whatsoever, according to Xenophanes.

iii. Was Xenophanes a Pantheist?

If Xenophanes cannot be read as an immaterialist then we may rightly question what sort of body “unlike mortals” can be attributed to the divine? Numerous writers, both ancient and modern, attribute to Xenophanes the viewpoint that god is spherical and identical with the universe. In Cicero’s Prior Academics, for example we find the following passage: “(Xenophanes said that) all things are one, that this is unchanging, and is god, that this never came into being and is eternal, and has a spherical shape.” (2.18) In another source, Theodoretus’ Treatment of Greek Afflictions, we find this statement: “Accordingly Xenophanes, the son of Orthomenes from Colophon, leader of the Eleatic School, said that the whole is one, spherical, and limited, not generated but eternally and totally motionless.” (4.5) More recently, Guthrie concludes after a careful analysis of recent texts that, “for Xenophanes the cosmos was a spherical body, living, conscious, and divine, the cause of its own internal movements and change. He was in the Ionian tradition.” (382)

One should not contradict such formidable scholarship lightly, but the fact of the matter is that there is no basis for the spherical/pantheistic interpretation in the fragments that are available to us. In fact, it is difficult to square the claims of pantheism with fragment 25, in which god “shakes all things by the thought of his mind;” it is perhaps even trickier to square the notion of a spherical god with another one of Xenophanes’ fragments in which he declares, “The upper limit of the earth is seen here at our feet, pushing up against the air, but that below goes on without limits” (frag. 28). Lesher, who has provided us with the most balanced and careful analysis of this question in recent years, makes a convincing case that the development of the spherical/pantheistic interpretation was “spawned in part by a confused assimilation of Xenophanes’ philosophy with that of Parmenides, misled by superficial similarities between Xenophanes’ god and Parmenides’ one ‘Being,’ and relying on an overly optimistic reading of some cryptic comments by Plato (Sophist 242c-d) and Aristotle (Metaphysics 986b10ff)” (100-101). In other words, the doxographical tradition seems to be guilty of viewing Xenophanes’ conception of the divine through a series of lenses that, when stacked upon each other, distort the original picture.

4. Natural and Scientific Views

The physical theories of Xenophanes have been ignored in much of the ancient literature, due in large part to the influence of Aristotle. According to The Philosopher, Xenophanes is to be classified as a theological theorist rather than a student of nature. As the fragments indicate, however, Xenophanes was indeed quite interested in theorizing about the natural world, and while his ideas are rather rudimentary by current standards, they do show a level of sophistication and coherence not always appreciated by his successors. As Lesher indicates: “We must then recognize the distinct possibility that Aristotle failed to mention Xenophanes’ physical views not because there were none to mention but because Aristotle regarded Xenophanes as insufficiently interested and engaged in physical theorizing to warrant discussion.” (127) Another reason for the disregard is that Xenophanes did not provide the kind of teleologically based insights into the natural phenomena that successors such as Plato and Aristotle would have desired. In any case, the physical theories of Xenophanes deserve more serious attention than they have been afforded historically.

a. Earth and Water as Fundamental

Xenophanes’ speculations on the physical world need to be understood within the context of his predecessors, the Milesian philosophers (Thales, Anaximenes, Anaximander). As the first metaphysicians, the Milesians attempted to determine the first principle or arche of reality. To briefly summarize for our purposes here, each of the Milesians postulated one primary principle (arche) as the source of everything else. For Thales, the arche was water. For Anaximenes, air was fundamental and all the other apparent “stuffs” of reality could be accounted for by a principle of condensation and rarefaction. For Anaximander, none of the traditional elements would suffice, and he identified the source of all things as a boundless or indefinite stuff termed apeiron.

Xenophanes sought to expand and improve upon the work of his predecessors, and instead of limiting his speculations to one stuff, or substance, his theory is based upon the interplay of two substances, earth and water. “All things that come into being and grow are earth and water.” (frag. 29) According to the historical sources, Xenophanes seems to have held that the opposition of wet and dry in the world is the preeminent explanatory basis for the phenomena of the natural world. In Hippolytus’ Refutation of All Heresies (1.14), for example, we are told that Xenophanes held that the history of the natural world has been a continually alternating process of extreme dryness and wetness. At the point of extreme wetness, the earth sinks completely into mud and all humans perish. Once the world begins to dry out there is a period of regeneration in which life on earth begins again. Xenophanes developed this theory based upon a wide variety of empirical evidence, particularly his examination of fossils. Again, a key source for this is Hippolytus, who discussed how Xenophanes gathered the proof for this thesis from the existence of various fossilized imprints of sea creatures as well as sea shells that are found far inland. It should be noted that what is significant about his viewpoint is not so much the conclusion at which he arrives, but rather the process he utilizes to support it. Prior thinkers had speculated on the possibility that the earth had been reduced to mud, but Xenophanes seems to have been the first to provide empirical evidence coupled with deduction to support and develop his theory. Thus, not only was Xenophanes probably “the first to draw attention to the real significance of fossils” (Kirk 177), we also find in him the beginnings of a scientific methodology.

b. Demythologizing Heavenly Phenomena

Although we do not have much by way of direct statements from Xenophanes, there is a good deal of ancient testimonia that references his astronomical and meteorological views, particularly his emphasis on the clouds and their explanatory role for various phenomena. According to a variety of sources, Xenophanes seems to have held the view that the sun comes into being—perhaps newly each day—either by a collection of ignited clouds (according to some) or by pieces of fiery earth. Students of early Greek philosophy will recognize the similarity to Heraclitus in this theory. It is commonly accepted that Xenophanes was an influential figure in the development of Heraclitus’ ideas. As such it is somewhat difficult to determine whether Xenophanes position here is authentic, or whether the ancient sources are reading Xenophanes through Heraclitus. Nevertheless, the historical speculation seems somewhat justified, particularly given the fact that Xenophanes proposed the view that the clouds were responsible for various heavenly phenomena. A key passage in this regard is fragment 32, where Xenophanes explains a rainbow: “And she whom they call Iris, this too is by nature a cloud, purple, red and greenish-yellow to behold.” Other instances where Xenophanes provides a natural explanation for what had been considered supernatural manifestations are in reference to stars as well as the phenomenon known as St. Elmo’s Fire (or Dioscuri) which is produced by glimmering clouds.

Further evidence of Xenophanes’ demythologizing tendencies occurs in the following passage:
The sea is the source of water and of wind,
for without the great sea there would be no wind
nor streams of rivers nor rainwater from on high;
but the great sea is the begetter of clouds, winds,
and rivers. (frag. 30)

It would have been natural for someone who had lived his life around bodies of water to make several observations about streams, winds and mists. What is lacking from Xenophanes and the traditional accounts is any clear explanation for why he held these beliefs. Why, for instance, did he think that the sea produced clouds and wind? Thus, as a purely scientific account, Xenophanes’ theory is lacking. Nevertheless, the true significance of this fragment becomes evident when it is read against the backdrop of Homeric poetry. As such, the true significance lies not in what the lines attempt to explain, but rather in what they attempt to explain away. “Without explicitly announcing their banishment,” As Lesher indicates, “Xenophanes has dispatched an array of traditional sea, river, cloud, wind, and rain deities (hence Zeus himself) to the explanatory sidelines.” (137) While Xenophanes is repeating ideas that had earlier been developed by Anaximander and Anaximenes, it is significant that he is carrying forward the criticism of traditional Homeric notions, particularly lines in the Iliad, “which characterize Oceanus as the source of all water—rivers, sea, springs and wells—and they declare that the sea is the source not only of rivers but also of rain wind and clouds.” (Guthrie  391). Ironically, Xenophanes’ value free speculations on the natural world, while a goal of scientific inquiry today, guaranteed that his physical theorizing would be disregarded by Plato and Aristotle.

5. Critique of Knowledge

According to many scholars, none of what Xenophanes has said up to this point would qualify him as a philosopher in the strict sense. It is Xenophanes’ contribution to epistemology, however, that ultimately seems to have earned him a place in the philosophical canon from a traditional standpoint. We have already seen how Xenophanes applies a critical rationality to the divine claims of his contemporaries, but he also advanced a skeptical outlook toward human knowledge in general.

…and of course the clear and certain truth no man has seen
nor will there be anyone who knows about the gods and what I say about all things.
For even if, in the best case, one happened to speak just of what has been brought to pass,
still he himself would not know. But opinion is allotted to all. (frag. 34)

If these statements are to be read—per many of the later skeptics—as a blanket claim that would render all positions meaningless, then it is difficult to see how anything Xenophanes has said up to this point should be taken with any seriousness or sincerity. How could Xenophanes put forth this kind of skepticism and be assured that the poets were wrong to portray the gods the way that they have, for instance? As such, a more charitable interpretation of these lines would seem to be in order.

A better reading of Xenophanes’ skeptical statements is to see them not as an attack on the possibility of knowledge per se, but rather as a charge against arrogance and dogmatism, particularly with regard to matters that we cannot directly experience. The human realm of knowledge is limited by what can be observed. “If,” for example, “god had not made yellow honey [we] would think that figs were much sweeter.” (frag. 38)  Therefore, broad based speculations on the workings of the divine and the cosmos are ultimately matters of opinion. Although some “opinions” would seem to square better with how things ought to be understood through rational thinking and our experiences of the world (keeping with Xenophanes’ earlier statements against the poets), any thoughts on such matters should be tempered by humility. Accordingly, F.R. Pickering notes, “Xenophanes is a natural epistemologist, who claims that statements concerning the non-evident realm of the divine as well as the far-reaching generalizations of natural sciences cannot be known with certainty but must remain the objects of opinion.” (233) Unfortunately, Xenophanes does not develop his critical empiricism, nor does he explain or examine how our various opinions might receive further justification. Still, just as the poet philosopher has provided us with some meaningful warnings toward our tendency to anthropomorphize our deities, the poet philosopher is also warning us against our natural human proclivity to confuse dogmatism with piety.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Barnes, Jonathan. The Presocratic Philosophers: Volume 1. London, Henley and Boston: Routledge & Kegan Paul, 1979.
  • Classen, C. Joachim. “Xenophanes and the Tradition of Epic Poetry.” Ionian Philosophy. Ed. K.J. Boudouris. Athens: International Association for Greek Philosophy: International Center for Greek Philosophy and Culture, 1989: 91-103.
  • Cleve, Felix M. The Giants of Pre-Sophistic Greek Philosophy. Vol 1. 2nd ed. The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff, 1969.
  • Fränkel, Hermann. “Xenophanes’ Empiricism and His Critique of Knowledge.” The Presocratics: A Collection of Critical Essays. Ed. Alexander P.D. Mourelatos. Garden City, N.Y.: Anchor Press Doubleday, 1974: 118-31.
  • Guthrie, W.K.C. A History of Greek Philosophy. Vol. 2. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1965.
  • Kirk, G.S., J.E. Raven and M. Schofield. The Presocratic Philosophers. 2nd ed. New York: Cambridge University Press, 1983.
  • Lesher, J.H. Xeonphanes of Colophon: Fragments: A Text and Translation with Commentary. Toronto: University of Toronto Press, 1992.
    • Lesher provides an excellent translation, commentary and analysis of Xenophanes. This is most thorough and balanced treatment of Xenophanes available in English.
  • Lesher, J.H. “Xenophanes’ Skepticism.” Essays in Ancient Greek Philosophy. Vol. 2. Albany, N.Y.: SUNY Press, 1983: 20-40
  • McKirahan, Richard D. Philosophy before Socrates. Indianapolis, IN: Hackett Publishing Company, Inc., 1994.
  • Pickering, F.R. “Xenophanes.” The Classical Review. Vol. 43, No. 2. 1993: 232-233.
  • Stokes, Michael C. One and Many in Presocratic Philosophy. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1971.
  • Vlastos, Gregory. “Theology and Philosophy in Early Greek Thought.” The Philosophical Quarterly. Vol. 2, No. 7. 1952: 97-123.

Author Information

Michael Patzia
Central College
U. S. A.

Gabriel Marcel (1889—1973)

The philosophical approach known as existentialism is commonly recognized for its view that life’s experiences and interactions are meaningless.  Many existentialist thinkers are led to conclude that life is only something to be tolerated, and that close or intimate relationships with others should be avoided. Heard distinctly among this despair and dread was the original philosophical voice of Gabriel Marcel.  Marcel, a World War I non-combatant veteran, pursued the life of an intellectual, and enjoyed success as a playwright, literary critic, and concert pianist.  He was trained in philosophy by Henri Bergson, among others.  A prolific life-long writer, his early works reflected his interest in idealism.  As Marcel developed philosophically, however, his work was marked by an emphasis on the concrete, on lived experience.  After converting to Catholicism in 1929, he became a noted opponent of atheistic existentialism, and primarily that of Jean-Paul Sartre.  Sartre’s characterizations of the isolated self, the death of God, and lived experience as having “no exit” especially disgusted Marcel.  Regardless of his point of departure, Marcel throughout his life balked at the designation of his philosophy as, “Theistic existentialism.”  He argued that, though theism was consistent with his existentialism, it was not an essential characteristic of it.

Marcel’s conception of freedom is the most philosophically enduring of all of his themes, although the last decade has seen a resurgence of attention paid to Marcel’s metaphysics and epistemology.  A decidedly unsystematic thinker, it is difficult to categorize Marcel’s work, in large part because the main Marcelian themes are so interconnected.  A close read, however, shows that in addition to that of freedom, Marcel’s important philosophical contributions were on the themes of participation, creative fidelity, exigence, and presence.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Freedom
  3. Participation
  4. Creative Fidelity
  5. Exigence
  6. Presence
  7. Hope and the Existential Self
  8. References and Further Reading

1. Life

Gabriel Marcel was born in Paris in 1889, the city where he also died in 1973.  Marcel was the only child of Henri and Laure Marcel.  His father was a French diplomat to Sweden and was committed to educating his son through frequent travel across Europe.  The death of his mother, in 1893 when Gabriel was not quite four years old left an indelible impression on him.  He was raised primarily by his mother’s sister, whom his father married two years after Laure’s passing, and though “Auntie” loved her nephew and gave him the best formal education, Gabriel loathed the structure of the classroom, and became excited about the intellectual life only after entering Sorbonne, from which he graduated in 1910.

Marcel was not a “dogmatic pacifist,” but experiences in World War I as a non-combatant solidified to Marcel the, “Desolate aspect that it [war] became an object of indignation, a horror without equal,” (AE 20) and contributed to a life-long fascination with death.  It was during the war that many of the important philosophical themes in Marcel’s later work would take root, and indeed, during the war, Marcel began writing in a journal that served as a framework for his first book, Metaphysical Journal (1927).

After the war, Marcel married Jaqueline Boegner, and he taught at a secondary school in Paris.  It was in these early wedded years that Marcel became engaged as a playwright, philosopher, and literary critic.  The couple continued to travel, they adopted a son, Jean Marie, and Marcel developed friendships with important thinkers of the day.  Marcel gave talks throughout Europe as a result of these contacts, and was regarded as a keen mind and a type of renaissance figure, excelling in music, drama, philosophy, theology, and politics.  As for his literary works, Marcel in total published more than 30 plays, a number of which have been translated in English and produced in the United States.  Marcel was acutely aware, however, that his dramatic work did not enjoy the popularity of his philosophical work, but he believed nonetheless that both were, “Capable of moving and often of absorbing readers very different from one another, living in the most diverse countries—beings whom it is not a question of counting precisely because they are human beings and belong as such to an order where number loses all meaning,” (AE, 27).

Although Marcel did not pursue anything more permanent than intermittent teaching posts at secondary schools, he did hold prestigious lectureships, giving the Gifford Lectures at Aberdeen in 1949-50 and the William James Lectures at Harvard in 1961.  His most significant philosophical works include Being and Having (1949), The Mystery of Being, Volume I and II (1950-51), Man against Mass Society (1962) and Creative Fidelity (1964). During his latter years, he emerged as a vocal political thinker, and played a crucial role in organizing and advocating the international Moral Re-Armament movement of the 1960s.  (Marcel was pleased to be awarded the Peace Prize of the Börsenverein des Buchhandels in 1964.)

Throughout his life, Marcel sought out, and was sought out by, various influential thinkers, including Paul Ricoeur, Jacques Maritain, Charles Du Bos, Gustave Thibon, and Emmanuel Levinas.  In spite of the many whom he positively influenced, Marcel became known for his very public disagreements with Jean-Paul Sartre.  In fact, the acrimony between the two became such that the two would attend performances of the other’s plays, only to storm out midway.  Perhaps the most fundamental ideological disagreement between the two was over the notion of autonomy.  For Marcel, autonomy is a discovery of the self as a being receptive to others, rather than as a power to be exerted.  Marcel’s autonomy is rooted in a commitment to participation with others (see 3 below), and is unique in that the participative subject is committed by being encountered, or approached by, another individual’s need.  Sartre’s notion of commitment is based on the strength of the solitary decisions made by individuals who have committed themselves fully to personal independence.  Yet, Marcel took commitment to be primarily the response to the appeal directed to the self as an individual (A 179) so that the self is free to respond to another on account of their mutual needs.  The feud between the two, though heated, had the effect of casting a shadow over Marcel’s work as “mysticism” rather than philosophy, a stigma that Marcel would work for the rest of his life to dispute.

2. Freedom

A strange inner mutation is spreading throughout humanity, according to Marcel.  As odd as it first seems, this mutation is evoked by the awareness that members of humanity are contingent on conditions which make up the framework for their very existence.  Man recognizes that at root, he is an existing thing, but he somehow feels compelled to prove his life is more significant than that.  He begins to believe that the things he surrounds himself with can make his life more meaningful or valuable.  This belief, says Marcel, has thrown man into a ghostly state of quandary caused by a desire to possess rather than to be.  All people become a master of defining their individual selves by either their possessions or by their professions.  Meaning is forced into life through these venues.  Even more, individuals begin to believe that their lives have worth because they are tied to these things, these objects.  This devolution creates a situation in which individuals experience the self only as a statement, as an object, “I am x.”

The objectification of the self through one’s possessions robs one of her freedom, and separates her from the experiences of her own participation in being.  The idolatrous world of perverted possession must be abandoned if the true reality of humanity is to be reached (SZ 285).  Perhaps most known for his views on freedom, Marcel gave to existentialism a view of freedom that marries the absolute indeterminacy of traditional existentialism with Marcel’s view that transcendence out of facticity can only come by depending upon others with the same goals.  The result is a type of freedom-by-degrees in which all people are free, since to be free is to be self-governing, but not all people experience freedom that can lead them out of objectification.  The experience of freedom cannot be achieved unless the subject extricates herself from the grip of egocentrism, since freedom is not simply doing what desire dictates.  The person who sees herself as autonomous within herself  has a freedom based on ill-fated egocentrism.  She errs in believing freedom to be rooted on independence.

Freedom is defined by Marcel in both a negative and positive sense.  Negatively, freedom is, “The absence of whatever resembles an alienation from oneself,” and positively as when, “The motives of my action are within the limits of what I can legitimately consider as the structural traits of my self,” (TF, 232).  Freedom, then, is always about the possibilities of the self, understood within the confines of relationships with others.  As an existentialist, Marcel’s freedom is tied to the raw experiences of the body.  However, the phenomenology of Marcelian freedom  is characterized by his insistence that freedom is something to be experienced, and the self is fully free when it is submerged in the possibilities of the self and the needs of others.  Although all humans have basic, autonomous freedom (Marcel thought of this as “capricious” freedom), in virtue of their embodiment and consciousness; only those persons who seek to experience being by freely engaging with other free beings can break out of the facticity of the body and into the fulfillment of being.  The free act is significant because it contributes to defining the self, “By freedom I am given back to myself,” (VII vii).

At first glance, Marcelian freedom is paradoxical:  the more one enters into a self-centered project, the less legitimate it is to say that the act is free, whereas the more the self is engaged with other free individuals, the more the self is free.  However, the phenomenological experience of freedom is less paradoxical when it is seen through the lens of the engagement of freedom.  Ontologically, we rarely have experiences of the singular self; instead, our experiences are bound to those with whom we interact.  Freedom based on the very participation that the free act seeks to affirm is the ground of the true experience of freedom towards which Marcel gravitates.

3. Participation

Marcel was an early proponent of what would become a major Sartrean existential tenet:  I am my body.  For Marcel, the body does not have instrumental value, nor is it simply a part or extension of the self.  Instead, the self cannot be eradicated from the body.  It is impossible for the self to conceive of the body in any way at all except for as a distinct entity identified with the self (CF 23).  Existence is prior, and existence is prior to any abstracting that we do on the basis of our perception.  Existence is indubitable, and existence is in opposition to the abstraction of objectivity (TW 225).  That we are body, of course, naturally lends us to think of the body in terms of object.  But individuals who resort to seeing the self and the world in terms of functionality are ontologically deficient because not only can they not properly respond to the needs of others, but they have become isolated and independent from others.  It is our active freedom that prevents us from the snare of objectifying the self, and which brings us into relationships with others.

When we are able to act freely, we can move away from the isolated perspective of the problematic man (“I am body only,”) to that of the participative subject (“I am a being among beings”) who is capable of interaction with others in the world.  Marcelian participation is possible through a special type of reflection in which the subject views herself as a being among beings, rather than as an object.  This reflection is secondary reflection, and is distinguished from both primary reflection and mere contemplation.  Primary reflection explains the relationship of an individual to the world based on her existence as an object in the world, whereas secondary reflection takes as its point of departure the being of the individual among others.  The goal of primary reflection, then, is to problematize the self and its relation to the world, and so it seeks to reduce and conquer particular things.  Marcel rejects primary reflection as applicable to ontological matters because he believes it cannot understand the main metaphysical issue involved in existence:  the incommunicable experience of the body as mine.  Neither does mere contemplation suffice to explain this phenomenon.  Contemplation is existentially significant, because it indicates the act by which the self concentrates its attention on its self, but such an act without secondary reflection would result in the same egocentrism that Marcel attempts to avoid through his work.

Secondary reflection has as its goal the explication of existence, which cannot be separated from the individual, who is in turn situated among others.  For Marcel, an understanding of one’s being is only possible through secondary reflection, since it is a reflection whereby the self asks itself how and from what starting point the self is able to proceed (E 14).  The existential impetus of secondary reflection cannot be overemphasized for Marcel:  Participation which involves the presence of the self to the world is only possible if the temptation to assume the self is wholly distinct from the world is overcome (CF 22).  The existential upshot is that secondary reflection allows the individual to seek out others, and it dissolves the dualism of primary reflection by realizing the lived body’s relation to the ego.

Reflexive reflection is the reflection of the exigent self (see 5 below).  It occurs when the subject is in communion with others, and is free and also dependent upon others (as discussed in 2).  Reflexive reflection is an inward looking that allows the self to be receptive to the call of others.  Yet, Marcel does not call on the participative subject to be reflective for receptivity’s sake.  Rather, the self cannot fully understand the existential position without orientating itself to something other than the self.

4. Creative Fidelity

For Marcel, to exist only as body is to exist problematically.  To exist existentially is to exist as a thinking, emotive, being, dependent upon the human creative impulse.  He believed that, “As soon as there is creation, we are in the realm of being,” and also that, “There is no sense using the word ‘being’ except where creation is in view,” (PGM xiii).  The person who is given in a situation to creative development experiences life qualitatively at a higher mode of being than those for whom experiences are another facet of their functionality.  Marcel argues that, “A really alive person is not merely someone who has a taste for life, but somebody who spreads that taste, showering it, as it were, around him; and a person who is really alive in this way has, quite apart from any tangible achievements of his, something essentially creative about him,” (VI, 139).  This is not to say, of course, that the creative impulse is measurable by what we produce.  Whereas works of art most explicitly express creative energy, inasmuch as we give ourselves to each other, acts of love, admiration, and friendship also describe the creative act.  In fact, participation with others is initiated through acts of feeling which not only allow the subject to experience the body as his own, but which enable him to respond to others as embodied, sensing, creative, participative beings as well.  To feel is a mode of participation, a creative act which draws the subject closer to an experience of the self as a being-among-beings, although higher degrees of participation are achieved by one whose acts demonstrate a commitment to that experience.  So, to create is to reject the reduction of the self to the level of abstraction—of object, “The denial of the more than human by the less than human,” (CF 10).

If the creative élan is a move away from the objectification of humanity, it must be essentially tied relationally to others.  Creative fidelity, then, entails a commitment to acts which draw the subject closer to others, and this must be balanced with a proper respect for the self.  Self-love, self-satisfaction, complacency, or even self-anger are attitudes which can paralyze one’s existential progress and mitigate against the creative impulse.  To be tenacious in the pursuit-- the fidelity aspect-- is the most crucial part of the creative impulse, since creation is a natural outflow of being embodied.  One can create, and create destructively.  To move towards a greater sense of being, one must have creative fidelity.  Fidelity exists only when it triumphs over the gap in presence from one being to another—when it helps others relate, and so defies absences in presence (CF 152).

It is not enough to be constant, since constancy is tenacity towards a specific goal, which requires neither presence nor an openness to change.  Rather, creative fidelity implies that there is presence, if it is true that faithfulness requires being available (in the Marcelian sense, see 5) to another even when it is difficult.  (Interestingly, Marcel’s notion of fidelity means more than someone’s merely not being unfaithful.  A spouse, for example, might not physically cheat on her husband, but on Marcel’s view, if she remains unavailable to her partner, she can only be called “constant”.  She cannot be called “faithful”.)  Additionally, fidelity requires that a subject be open to changing her mind, actions, and beliefs if those things do not contribute to a better grasp of what it means to be.  Since fidelity is a predicate that is best ascribed by others to us, it follows that receptivity to the views of others’ is a natural component of fidelity.

But what is it that Marcel thinks we ought to be faithful towards? It isn’t simply to pursue the impetus of the exigent life, although that is involved.  More concretely, creative fidelity is a fidelity towards being free, and that freedom involves making decisions about what is important, rather than living in a state of stasis.  Marcel railed against indecision with respect to what is essential, even though such indecision, “Seems to be the mark and privilege of the illumined mind,” (CF 190) because truly free people are not entrapped by their beliefs, but are liberated by living out their consequences (see 2).

5. Exigence

Dominating Marcel’s philosophical development was the intersection of his interest in the individuality of beings and his interest in the relations which bind beings together.  An acceptable ontology must account for the totality of the lived experience, and so must have as a point of departure the fact that humans are fundamentally embodied.  From there, ontology must explain how an individual fits among other individuals, and so must account for what it means to experience and have relations in the world.  Ontological exigence is the Marcelian actualization of transcendence, which is manifested as a thirst for the fullness of being and a demand to transcend the world of abstract objectivity.  This desire to be fulfilled within the body, however, is not a desire for perfection (which cannot be achieved) but is instead, “The contradiction of the functionalized world and of the overpowering monotony of a society in which it becomes increasingly difficult to differentiate between members of society,” (V. II, 42).  The typical person (that is, the “Problematic man”) has become an object to him or herself through sheer busyness of life, through a lack of meaningful relationships with others, and through the intrusion of technological advancement.  The exigent person can transcend her problematicity—indeed, she, “Gradually develops individuality” (CF 149), and she does this by being aware of the self as a body in relation with, and in participation with, others in the world.  (The cognitive subject cannot seek the fulfilled state of the exigent self in a meaningful way, and the experiencing subject cannot see beyond herself as an object.  It is the participative subject, who is governed by the uniquely Marcelian doctrines of reflection, communion, receptivity, and availability, which can move from self-as-body to self-as-being among beings.)

The reflective focus of the exigent self occurs most effectively when the subject is involved in a community of people who are mutually receptive and accepting of others’ experiences and needs.  Just as secondary reflection must be active in order to participate with others, the exigent self’s reflexive reflection is rooted in an active, more developed sense of availability to others (see  3).  This availability is not passive; rather, the exigent self actively seeks out relationships with others, just as she is actively engaged in the concern for others.  Whereas a subject’s passivity can result in fear, hesitancy, and powerlessness, the action of the exigent self can allow her to positively change a situation for another person.  The force of the exigent life comes through the experience of being that is only found in sharing with others in being.  The most significant end achievable for an individual is to be immersed in the beings of others, for only with others does the self experience wholeness of being.  (This isn’t to say, of course, that the self will experience wholeness just in virtue of her being available to others.  Availability is a risk one takes, since it is only through availability that the potential for fullness emerges as possible.)

In opposition to exigence is the life of the problematic man.  There is a polarity between what is given in the technological world (a world in which things are objectified according to their function—biological, political, economic, social) and the fullness of being, which resists abstract determinations.  Marcel argued that, “Nothing is more awful than this reduction of man, of a human being by such distinctions,” (TW 225-6).  The exigent life is repelled by this reduction, and serves as a protest against it.  Exigence provides a recourse to a type of experience which bears within itself the warrant of its own value.  It is the substitution of one mode of experience for another; one that strives towards an increasingly pure mode of existence (VI ix).

6. Presence

The term “presence” is used in various ways in the English language, although each connote a “here-ness” that indicates whether or not a subject was “here”.  One of the differences in how we use the term is in the strength of a thing’s “here-ness”.  Two people sitting in close physical proximity on an airplane might not be present to each other, although people miles away speaking on a phone might have a stronger awareness of being together.  There is mystery in presence, according to Marcel, because presence can transcend the objective physical fact of being-with each other.   Presence is concerned with recognizing the self as a being-among-beings, and acknowledging the relevance of others’ experiences to the self, as a being.

The notion of presence for Marcel is comprised of two other parallel notions, communion and availability.  Together, communion and availability enable an individual to come into a complete participation with another being.  Although “presence” is found throughout Marcel’s work, he admits that it is impossible to give a rigorous definition of it.  Rather than working out a lexical definition of the term, we ought to evoke its meaning through our shared experiences.  Marcel demonstrates this by noting how easy it is to find ourselves with others who are not significantly present at all, and at other times we are present to those who are not physically with us at all.  The mark of presence is the mutual tie to the other.  For Marcel, it means that the self is “given” to the other, and that givenness is responsively received or reciprocated.  (The reciprocity of presence is a necessary condition for it.)  Presence is shared, then, in virtue of our openness to each other.

This openness is not linguistically based, since it is beyond the physical relation and communication among individuals.  Non-linguistic presence is possible for Marcel because of an aspect of presence Marcel calls “communion”.  Communion with other participative beings is renewing to the self as a result of the other giving to me out of who he is, rather than merely by what he says.  Marcel almost certainly borrows from Martin Buber’s I-Thou in his view of communion, in that Buber’s ontological communion is the free expression of those who are able to give and receive freely to each other so that an encounter with the other is possible, and for Marcel this communion is expressed as a free reception of the other to oneself (IB 136).  Communion-as-encounter, according to Marcel (GR 273), is encapsulated by the French en, whereas in English, within best represents the envelopment of one’s being that occurs in communion.  A shared experience allows for a more full understanding of one’s own being.  If the self is in communion with another, and is present to the other, the self is more present towards the self.  Communion with others can give new meaning to experiences that otherwise would have been closed to the self.

For interactions in which there is communication without communion, Marcel believes that the self becomes an object to the one with whom the communication is occurring.  And, where there is objectification, there cannot be participation, and without the availability of participation, there cannot be presence.  A key aspect of communion, then, is the way it limits the objectification of beings.  Marcel argues that one cannot have presence with—that is, one cannot welcome or gather to the self—whatever is purely and simply an object.  For objects, the self can take it or leave it, but presence can only be invoked or evoked (VI 208).  Presence that results from communion produces a bond between those who are in participation with another, who are receptive to another, and who are committed to sharing in each others’ experiences.

Communion is necessary for presence, but is entwined with Marcel’s notion of availability, disponibilité.  If it is true that participative beings can have communion with each other, and so encounter one another, then there must be another component to presence that enables a once-objectified person to respond to the encounter of communion.  The ability to yield to that which is encountered, and so to pledge oneself to another, is the component of presence that Marcel calls availability (HV 23).  Availability can be understood as being at hand, or handiness, so that a person is ready to respond to another when called upon.  The available subject seeks out other available subjects as individuals whose experiences can compliment and more fully speak to her.  Of course, for another’s experiences to speak to the subject, she must be open to the influence and needs of the other.  But this openness cannot result in the objectification of the subject by the other.  To be available is not to be possessed as an object.  Rather, to be available means that that the best use the subject can make of her freedom is to place it in the other’s hands, as a free response to who the other is.  The subject is not an object to be disposed of, then, but a fellow subject in need of the influence of the experiences of the other.

The positive result of living an available life is that it makes the subject more fully aware of herself than she would be if she did not have the relationship.  No longer does the subject have to struggle with her facticity, but she can find contentment through the mutual presence—from the communion and availability she has with a community of beings, all of whom are committed to the same end.  Just as the joints of the skeleton are conjoined and adapted to bones, Marcel contends that the individual life finds its justification and its meaning by being inwardly conjoined, adapted, and oriented towards something other than itself (V I, 201-2).

There are, certainly, detriments to the life of presence that Marcel explicates.  He penned as many words on unavailability, indisponibilité as he did availability, and with good reason:  obstacles frequently occur when individuals attempt to coalesce their experiences to emerge as stronger, more cohesive beings.  Almost all occurrences of unavailability result form an individual seeking fulfillment through the objectification of the self.  To be unavailable is to be preoccupied with the self as an object, to be self-centered in such a way as to exclude the possibility of engaging with others as subjects (BH 74, 78).  The unavailable person is characterized by an absorption with her self, whether with her own successes and accomplishments or her own problems.  She can feel temporary satisfaction by wallowing in herself, but she only experiences herself as object, and so cannot be whole.  Whatever brief satisfaction the unavailable individual has, it is short-lived because she becomes encumbered—for Marcel, “used up”—by all of the things by which she attempts to define herself:  job, family, poor health, indebtedness, etc.  Marcel compares the encumbered, unavailable life, to a hand-written draft of a manuscript.  Just as the clutter of editing marks on a draft disables the author from figuring out what is important to the central ideas, the encumbered self no longer has access to her own point of view.  The result is frustration, apathy, or distrust in oneself or others.  The weight of encumbrance renders the self incapable of presence, and so the self becomes opaque.  The opaque person ceased to let his presence pass into the world, and so has blocked the experiences of others to help inform and shape his own.

7. Hope and the Existential Self

The existential life that Marcel paints as possible for humanity is largely one of hope—but not one of optimism.   Being in the world as body allows one to seek out new opportunities for the self, and so Marcelian hope is deeply pragmatic in that it refuses to compute all of the possibilities against oneself.  But the picture is not rosy.  Hope for Marcel is not faith that things will go well, because most often, things do not go well.  The depravity of the problematic man threatens to suffocate.  Yet, even if there is despair in our situation, there is always movement towards something more.  This movement towards is the philosophical project for Gabriel Marcel.  If there is always movement, and always more to reach for, the existential self is never complete (and indeed, this is why Marcel refused to categorize his existential project as a “system” or “dialectic”).  The mystery of being for the existential self is unsolvable, because it is not a problem to be solved.

The notion of “hope” for Marcel relies upon a significant Marcelian distinction between problem and mystery.  For the problematic man (see section 2) each aspect of life is reduced to the level of a problem, so that the self and all of its relationships, goals, and desires are treated as obstacles to be conquered.  Life is, for the problematic man, a series of opportunities to possess, and the body is alienated from the problematic man’s own corporeality.  Not only is such a person separated from his own being as a result, he is distanced from the true mystery of being.  If I am my body, and I want to inquire into being, I must grasp that being is a philosophical mystery to be engaged with rather than a problem to be solved.  The existential self, upon recognizing that the self is not something that is possessed, can then shift his thought from questioning the significance of his own existence as a matter of fact, to questioning how he is related to his body.  The vital cannot be separated from the spiritual, since the spiritual is conditioned on the body, which can then provide for opportunities and so, for hope.

The mystery of being, then, is a tale to be told, analyzed, probed, and worked toward.  To be sure, even as experiences change, society evolves, and relations emerge, the individual who seeks meaning through an investigation of their being will never be fully satisfied.  If Marcel’s ontology is viable, and the self can question who it is that asks Who am I?, then the self will find the answer to be constantly in flux.

8. References and Further Reading

  • Bollnow, Otto Friedrich. “Marcel’s Concept of Availability,” In The Philosophy of Gabriel Marcel:  The Library of Living Philosophers, 17.  Edited by Paul Arthur Schlipp and Lewis Edwin Hahn.  LaSalle, IL:  Open Court, 1984.  Abbreviated A.
  • Gallagher, Kenneth T. The Philosophy of Gabriel Marcel. NY: Fordham University Press, 1962.  Abbreviated PGM.
  • Marcel, Gabriel. “Autobiographical Essay,” In The Philosophy of Gabriel Marcel: The Library of Living Philosophers, 17.  Edited by Paul Arthur Schlipp and Lewis Edwin Hahn.  LaSalle, IL:  Open Court, 1984.  Abbreviated AE.
  • Marcel, Gabriel. Being and Having.  New York:  Harper & Row, 1965. Abbreviated BH.
  • Marcel, Gabriel. Creative Fidelity. NY:  Noonday Press, 1970.  Abbreviated CF.
  • Marcel, Gabriel. “Existence,”  New Scholasticism 38, no. 2 (April 1964).  Abbreviated E.
  • Marcel, Gabriel.  omo Viator: Introduction to a Metaphysic of Hope, tr. Emma Craufurd (Chicago:  Harper & Row), 1965.  Abbreviated HV.
  • Marcel, Gabriel. The Mystery of Being, Volume I and II.  Chicago: Charles Regnery Co, 1951. Abbreviated V. I and V.II.
  • Marcel, Gabriel. “Reply to Gene Reeves,” In The Philosophy of Gabriel Marcel:  The Library of Living Philosophers, 17.  Edited by Paul Arthur Schlipp and Lewis Edwin Hahn.  LaSalle, IL:  Open Court, 1984.  Abbreviated GR.
  • Marcel, Gabriel. Tragic Wisdom and Beyond.  Evanston, IL:  Northwestern University Press, 1973.  Abbreviated TW.
  • Marcel, Gabriel. “Truth and Freedom,” Philosophy Today 9 (1965).  Abbreviated TF.
  • Strauss, E.W. and M. Machado, “Marcel’s Notion of Incarnate Being,” In The Philosophy of Gabriel Marcel:  The Library of Living Philosophers, 17.  Edited by Paul Arthur Schlipp and Lewis Edwin Hahn.  LaSalle, IL:  Open Court, 1984.  Abbreviated IB.
  • Zuidema, S.U. “Gabriel Marcel: A Critique,” Philosophy Today 4, no. 4 (Winter 1960).  Abbreviated SZ.

Author Information:

Jill Graper Hernandez
University of Texas at San Antonio
U. S. A.

John Hick (1922—2012)

John HickJohn Hick is arguably one of the most important and influential philosophers of religion of the second half of the twentieth century. As a British philosopher in the anglo-analytic tradition, Hick did groundbreaking work in religious epistemology, philosophical theology, and religious pluralism.

As a young law student, Hick underwent a strong religious experience that led him to accept evangelical Christianity and to change his career direction to theology and philosophy. This experience would prove not only life-altering but also important for his subsequent philosophical views. Early in his career, Hick argued that Christian faith is based not on propositional evidence but on religious experience. He thus defended Christian faith against the evidentialist criticisms of the then dominant logical positivists. During this stage Hick also developed his Irenaean “soul-making” theodicy in which he argued that God allows evil and suffering in the world in order to develop humans into virtuous creatures capable of following his will.

In the late 1960s, Hick had another set of experiences that dramatically affected his life and work. While working on civil rights issues in Birmingham, he found himself working and worshiping alongside people of other faiths. During this time he began to believe that sincere adherents of other faiths experience the Transcendent just as Christians do, though with variances due to cultural, historical, and doctrinal factors. These experiences led him to develop his pluralistic hypothesis, which, relying heavily on Kant’s phenomenal/noumenal distinction, states that adherents of the major religious faiths experience the ineffable Real through their varying culturally shaped lenses. Hick’s pluralistic considerations then led him to adjust his theological positions, and he subsequently developed interpretations of Christian doctrines, such as the incarnation, atonement, and trinity, not as metaphysical claims but as metaphorical or mythological ones. However, despite Hick’s changes theologically, many of his underlying philosophical positions remained largely intact over the course of his long career.

Hick’s most influential works include Faith and Knowledge, Evil and the God of Love, Death and Eternal Life, The Myth of God Incarnate (ed.), and An Interpretation of Religion. Other of his significant works include Arguments for the Existence of God, God Has Many Names, The Metaphor of God Incarnate, A Christian Theology of Religions, The New Frontier of Religion and Science, and his widely used textbook, Philosophy of Religion.

Table of Conents

  1. Life
  2. Religious Epistemology
    1. Religious Experience
    2. Eschatological Verification
    3. Religion and Neuroscience
  3. Philosophical Theology
    1. Irenaean “Soul-making” Theodicy
    2. Christology as Myth or Metaphor
    3. Death and Afterlife
  4. Religious Pluralism
    1. Religious Ambiguity
    2. Kantian Phenomenal/Noumenal Distinction and the Transcategorial Real
    3. Soteriological and Ethical Criteria
    4. Religious Language as Mythological
  5. Criticisms and Influences
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Life

John Harwood Hick was born in January 1922 to Mark and Aileen Hick in Scarborough, England. The Hick family history involves a Scarborough shipping trade that can be traced back at least as far as the mid-eighteenth century. Hick was a middle child, whose older brother Pentland became an entrepreneur and younger sister Shirley had a successful career in social work. Hick grew up in a working middle-class family in Scarborough, where as a shy boy he had an unfavorable time at the nearby preparatory school, Lisvane. After briefly studying at home with a private tutor, Hick spent two more favorable years (1937-38) at a Quaker boarding school, Bootham, in York. After Bootham, Hick returned to Scarborough to work as an articled clerk for his father’s small law firm, Hick & Hands.

By the age of seventeen, Hick was reading many of the major works of Western philosophy, finding especially fascinating Kant, who would shape his later philosophical pursuits. Hick’s family was not known for academics, despite two notable exceptions from his mother’s side: Benjamin Cocker, who taught philosophy at the University of Michigan in the late nineteenth century, and Hick’s great uncle, Edward Wales Hirst, who taught Christian Ethics at Manchester University and elsewhere. Hirst encouraged Hick to pursue academic philosophy and continued to correspond with him after he decided instead to study law. While still working at Hick & Hands, Hick began commuting twice a week to University College, Hull, to attend law lectures. This was shortly before the outbreak of World War II and the bombing of Britain, and by his second term Hick had moved to a hostel closer to campus in order to study full-time.

Hick’s family was not particularly religious, though his mother and grandmother had both experimented widely in a variety of religious practices, which helped develop in him a keen religious interest from a young age. He had a penchant for leftist, anti-Christian literature of the likes of George Bernard Shaw, H. G. Wells, Bertrand Russell, and others; yet in the midst of the turmoil at the outbreak of the war, Hick found himself turning to evangelical Christianity under the influence of his college friends from the Inter-Varsity Fellowship. Hick writes of his experience:

As a law student at University College, Hull, at the age of eighteen, I underwent a powerful evangelical conversion under the impact of the New Testament figure of Jesus. For several days I was in a state of intense mental and emotional turmoil, during which I became increasingly aware of a higher truth and greater reality pressing in upon me and claiming my recognition and response. At first this was highly unwelcome, a disturbing and challenging demand for nothing less than a revolution in personal identity. But then the disturbing claim became a liberating invitation. The reality that was pressing in upon me was not only awesomely demanding.... but also irresistibly attractive, and I entered with great joy and excitement into the world of Christian faith.... An experience of this kind which I cannot forget, even though it happened forty-two years ago [from 1982], occurred—of all places—on the top deck of a bus in the middle of the city of Hull.... As everyone will be very conscious who can themselves remember such a moment, all descriptions are inadequate. But it was as though the skies opened up and light poured down and filled me with a sense of overflowing joy, in response to an immense transcendent goodness and love. I remember that I couldn’t help smiling broadly—smiling back, as it were, at God – though if any of the other passengers were looking they must have thought that I was a lunatic, grinning at nothing. (Autobiography, 33-34)

Though Hick now views his subsequent evangelical years as something of an anomaly on the span of his intellectual biography, at the time it had a dramatic, life-changing impact. He immediately left law to study for Christian ministry, at first still at Hull but shortly thereafter at Edinburgh. While at Edinburgh he studied philosophy under Norman Kemp Smith, who left an indelible impression on the young Hick.

Hick’s time at Edinburgh was interrupted, however, by World War II. As a conscientious objector—much to the dismay of his father—Hick declined the draft and instead served with the Friends Ambulance Unit in Egypt, Italy and Greece. Upon returning from the war, he resumed at Edinburgh, where he graduated in 1948 before going to Oriel College, Oxford, to earn his doctorate in philosophy. At Oxford Hick studied under H. H. Price, and Hick’s thesis became the basis for his first book, Faith and Knowledge.

Hick then went to Westminster College, Cambridge, in 1950, where for the next three years he studied for the Presbyterian ministry, primarily under theologian H. H. Farmer. At Westminster Hick met his soon-to-be wife, Hazel. After graduating from Westminster, he was inducted as minister of Belford Presbyterian church in the small town of Belford, Northumberland, in August 1953. Later that month he and Hazel were married in the church, where Hick served as minister for two and a half years and where the Hicks had their first daughter, Eleanor, in June 1955.

Hick left Belford for the U.S., where in the spring semester of 1956 he began an assistant professorship in philosophy at Cornell University in Ithaca, New York. The following year he published Faith and Knowledge with Cornell University Press. At the time Cornell’s philosophy faculty included Max Black, Norman Malcolm, and John Rawls, among others, and was known as a center for Wittgensteinian thought. Hick taught at Cornell for three and a half years, but not being himself Wittgensteinian, he looked elsewhere for a teaching position. While at Cornell the Hicks had two sons: Mark, born in 1957, and Peter, born toward the end of their time in Ithaca.

In the fall of 1959, Hick moved from Cornell to the Stuart chair of Christian philosophy at Princeton Theological Seminary. While at Princeton he became the center of controversy with the Presbyterian synod of New Jersey for not affirming—though not necessarily denying—the virgin birth of Christ. The case received national attention and was eventually decided in Hick’s favor, allowing him to remain in his professorship.

In 1963 Hick received the Guggenheim Fellowship as well as a one year S. A. Cooke Bye-Fellowship at Gonville and Caius College, Cambridge, where for the following year he worked on what would become his second monograph, Evil and the God of Love. During his sabbatical at Cambridge, a lectureship in philosophy of religion opened there, to which Hick was appointed. He taught one last semester at Princeton Seminary before moving to Cambridge.

During Hick’s third year at Cambridge, the H. G. Wood chair of philosophy of religion at Birmingham—previously held by Ninian Smart—opened, and Hick received the appointment. It was at Birmingham that Hick’s pluralistic outlook began to take shape, as he spent much of his time outside of class with multi-faith groups working on race issues in and around the city. He writes of his experiences:

As I spent time in mosques, synagogues, gurudwaras and temples as well as churches something very important dawned on me. On the one hand all the externals were different.... And not only the externals, but also the languages, the concepts, the scriptures, the traditions are all different and distinctive. But at a deeper level it seemed evident to me that essentially the same thing was going on in all these different places of worship, namely men and women were coming together under the auspices of some ancient, highly developed tradition which enables them to open their minds and hearts “upwards” toward a higher divine reality which makes a claim on the living of their lives. (Autobiography, 160)

Hick subsequently became heavily involved with the group All Faiths for One Race, working on civil rights issues in and around Birmingham. He also began studying Eastern religions, traveling to India to study Hinduism, Punjab to study Sikhism, and Sri Lanka to study Buddhism. The fruit of this study would be his extensive work, Death and Eternal Life, in which he explores various Eastern and Western conceptions of the afterlife and develops an afterlife hypothesis combining elements from Eastern and Western traditions.

In 1977 Hick became embroiled in further controversy after the publication of his edited work, The Myth of God Incarnate. Hick admits that the title was intentionally provocative as an attempt to open the ideas of the book to a larger audience. In this he succeeded, as the book sold thirty-thousand copies in the first six months and was translated into various languages. During their time at Birmingham, the Hicks also had their youngest son, Mike, who at the age of twenty-four would be killed in a tragic climbing accident in the French Alps.

In 1978 Hick gave a lecture at Claremont Graduate University near Los Angeles and was subsequently offered the position of Danforth professor of philosophy of religion. For his first three years, he split his year between Claremont and Birmingham—even spending the summer of 1980 teaching in South Africa, where he met Desmond Tutu, who would become a life-long friend—but beginning in 1982 Hick moved full-time to Claremont. He spent the next ten years at Claremont teaching, organizing conferences in philosophy of religion, and developing his pluralistic hypothesis, which he would present as his Gifford Lectures in 1986-87 and publish as An Interpretation of Religion in 1989 to much critical praise, including the prestigious Grawemeyer Award. During his time at Claremont, Hick’s pluralism took a less theistic turn, due in large measure to his interaction with Buddhist philosophers in the U.S. and Japan, including his Claremont colleague, Masao Abe.

In 1992, at the age of seventy, Hick retired from Claremont and moved back to Birmingham. In 1996 his wife Hazel died of a sudden massive stroke while Hick was recovering from spinal surgery. Throughout the 1990s he continued to travel often to the U.S. and elsewhere for conferences and lectures. Throughout the 2000s, he became less mobile but still managed to continue academic work, continuing a close relationship with Birmingham University as a Fellow of its Institute for Advanced Research in Arts and Social Sciences and publishing a number of books, including The New Frontier of Religion and Science: Religion, Neuroscience and the Transcendent in 2006, Who or What is God? And Other Investigations in 2008, and Beyond Faith and Doubt: Dialogues on Religion and Reason in 2010. In 2011 the University of Birmingham launched the John Hick Centre for Philosophy of Religion and later the same year awarded him an honorary doctorate of divinity, at which time he gave his last public speech. John Hick died on February 9, 2012, just weeks after celebrating his ninetieth birthday.

2. Religious Epistemology

a. Religious Experience

Though Hick’s religious views changed significantly throughout his career, most of the themes of his mature religious epistemology are already present in his first work, Faith and Knowledge. Indeed, it would be difficult to overestimate the importance of this work for contemporary religious epistemology. Instead of describing faith as propositional assent to certain beliefs, Hick describes faith as the interpretive element in religious experience or “experiencing-as”—experiencing the world as not only natural and ethical but as the sphere of the religious as well. While Faith and Knowledge can be read as an apologetic for Christian faith, Hick’s explicit aims are more modest. Rather than demonstrating that God does in fact exist, Hick’s aim is to describe how God is known to humans, if God does exist, and how such knowledge relates to other forms of human knowledge. According to Hick, the difference between faith and other forms of knowledge is not one of kind but of the level of reality known. Just as ethical knowledge supervenes on natural knowledge, so too religious knowledge supervenes on both ethical and natural knowledge.

In arguing for his experience-based understanding of faith, Hick discusses prior understandings of faith, rejecting some elements while retaining others. Hick challenges the traditional Christian definitions of faith as a form of propositional belief, either in the Thomist-Catholic form as a matter of a voluntaristic or fideistic intellectual assent to a certain set of divinely revealed doctrinal propositions, or in the modern voluntarist views, represented by Pascal’s wager and the pragmatism of James. Hick is more ambivalent about Kant’s understanding of faith as a postulate from moral judgment. He approvingly cites Hume and Kant’s attacks on natural theology, holding that there are no compelling arguments for God’s existence. However, according to Kant, even though we cannot offer a logical demonstration for belief in God, nevertheless, “For the practical reason, pursuing the summum bonum, must assume that its attainment is possible, and must therefore postulate a Good Will powerful enough to ensure a final apportionment of happiness to virtue” (Faith and Knowledge, 2d ed. [FK], 61). For Kant, faith is thus not a matter of theoretical rationality based on naturally or divinely revealed propositions, but is a matter of practical rationality based on our moral judgments. Hick discusses this line of reasoning in response to a contemporary advocate, Donald Baillie, before ultimately rejecting the conclusion that our moral intuitions can be used as a proof for God’s existence. However, while Hick rejects the inference from our moral intuitions to the existence of God as a proof, he integrates a similar strand from Baillie into his own view, in which “our apprehension of the divine [is] mediated through our apprehension of values” (FK, 68). Building on this insight, Hick discusses Cardinal Newman’s understanding of faith as an “illative sense,” which Hick defines as “the acquired capacity to respond to indefinable indications in a given field and to marshal a mass of apparently unrelated evidences and divine their trend” (FK, 91). While Hick approvingly discusses Newman’s view that faith consists of a “global impression” or “interpretation,” he takes Newman’s view a step further and raises the even more fundamental question of “whether faith, in its primary sense, is rightly regarded as a propositional attitude at all” (FK, 91). It is the view of faith as a propositional attitude—in any of the forms discussed above—that Hick ultimately rejects.

Instead, Hick argues that for the ordinary believer, religious knowledge is gained by experiencing God for oneself. Religious knowledge, then, is mediated through our experience of the world, in much the same way that the rest of the knowledge we have about the world is gained. Hick calls this aspect of our human experience of the world “significance,” which he further defines as “that fundamental and all pervasive characteristic of our conscious experience which de facto constitutes it for us the experience of a ‘world’ and not merely empty void or churning chaos” (FK, 98). Hick then posits the notion of “interpretation” as the “correlative mental activity by which [significance] is apprehended,” stating,

We shall find that interpretation takes place in relation to each of the three main types of existence.... recognized by human thought—the natural, the human, and the divine; and that in order to relate ourselves appropriately to each, a primary and unevidenceable act of interpretation is required which, when directed toward God, has traditionally been termed “faith.” Thus I shall try to show that while the object of religious knowledge is unique, its basic epistemological pattern is that of all our knowing. (FK, 96-97)

Religious interpretation is thus a perception of significance rather than an inference from or to certain propositions. As Hick further explains,

the primary religious perception, or basic act of religious interpretation, is not to be described as either a reasoned conclusion or an unreasoned hunch that there is a God. It is, putatively, an apprehension of the divine presence within the believer’s human experience. It is not an inference to a general truth, but a “divine-human encounter,” a mediated meeting with the living God. (FK, 115)

Religious interpretation, however, is no worse off than any other kind of perception about the world, since, as Hick argues, “we must accept the Kantian thesis that we can be aware only of that which enters into a certain framework of basic relations which is correlated with the structure of our own consciousness” (FK, 98). In other words, once the Kantian paradigm is accepted, it becomes evident that every experience of the world—natural, ethical, and religious—involves an act of interpreting significance. Religious interpretation is simply the highest order of experiencing the world, not something of a different epistemological kind.

b. Eschatological Verification

Though Hick wrote Faith and Knowledge just as logical positivism was beginning to wane, the logical positivists’ attack upon metaphysics, and theism more specifically, still had enormous residual influence. According to the logical positivists’ verification criterion of cognitive meaning, non-empirical claims are such that they cannot in principle be true or false. Only those claims that can in principle be empirically verified have cognitive meaning. In response to this attack on religious claims, Hick posits the notion of eschatological verification. Eschatological verification is intended to respond to the logical positivists on their own terms by providing a possible scenario in which verification conditions for certain Christian claims obtain, and thus such claims are shown to be cognitively meaningful. So, for the sake of argument, Hick accepts the verification criterion. He then argues that the content of Christian faith can be verified in the afterlife if it is true, though if it is false it cannot be falsified, since there would be no afterlife in which to falsify one’s beliefs. To illustrate his principle of eschatological verification, he offers a parable of two men traveling along a road that one believes leads to a Celestial City and the other believes leads to nowhere. Though they each have the same experiences along the road, the first interprets the experiences as trials to prepare him for the Celestial City, while the other finds the experiences to have no larger meaning. Of the experiences of the travelers in his parable, Hick describes:

During the course of the journey the issue between them is not an experimental one. They do not entertain different expectations about the coming details of the road, but only about its ultimate destination. And yet when they do turn the last corner it will be apparent that one of them has been right all the time and the other wrong. Thus, although the issue between them has not been experimental, it has nevertheless from the start been a real issue. They have not merely felt differently about the road; for one was feeling appropriately and the other inappropriately in relation to the actual state of affairs. Their opposed interpretations of the road constituted genuinely rival assertions, though assertions whose status has the peculiar characteristic of being guaranteed retrospectively by a future crux. (FK, 177-78)

In the same way, Hick argues that the eschatological expectations of the Christian believer provide “an experientially verifiable claim, in virtue of which the belief-system as a whole is established as being factually true-or-false” (FK, 195). He thus argues—contra most logical positivists and Christian believers at the time—that Christian belief is compatible with the logical positivists’ criterion of verification. Though for Hick the world is sufficiently ambiguous to be interpreted theistically or atheistically, nevertheless, “the theistic assertion is indeed—whether true or false—a genuinely factual assertion” (FK, 195).

c. Religion and Neuroscience

Whereas logical positivism provided a formidable objection to religious belief in the twentieth century, neuroscience offers a possible objection to religious belief in the twenty-first century. Instead of judging religious language to be meaningless, as logical positivism had done, the objection from neuroscience is that religious experience is delusory. However, just as Hick found the objection of the logical positivists to be unfounded, so too in his more recent work, The New Frontier of Religion and Science, he finds the objection from neuroscience wanting. He protests that neuroscientists themselves often do not have the philosophical acumen necessary to interpret their research and that many philosophers of mind only give token attention to the findings from neuroscience, assuming a naturalistic worldview from the outset. The result is that it is practically taken as fact that neuroscience has proven a materialist view of persons, when in fact the evidence is ambiguous.

Hick concedes that for every mental event there is a corresponding physical event in the brain, but he argues that proving a brain/mind correlation is a far cry from proving brain/mind identity. He further concedes that brain stimulation through drugs, epileptic seizures, and brain surgery may produce non-veridical religious experiences, but he argues that the ability to cause religious hallucinations does nothing to rule out the possibility of authentic religious experiences.

In response to the naturalist objection from neuroscience, Hick takes a brief foray into the philosophy of mind. He argues first that mind/brain identity is extremely implausible. As he states, “The basic problem [with mind/brain identity] is that not even the most complete account of brain function reaches the actual conscious experience with which it is associated” (The New Frontier of Religion and Science [NFRS], 85). Because many philosophers of mind presuppose a materialist view of persons, they simply beg the question by assuming that mental events are identical to brain events. But for Hick this is simply “an article of naturalistic faith” (NFRS, 91). Despite the ingenuity of naturalist philosophers of mind, consciousness continues to elude a strictly materialist description. Hick next argues that the varieties of epiphenomenalism—in which consciousness is a non-causal byproduct of brain function—fare no better than identity views. If epiphenomenalism is true, then consciousness serves no biological role, and “its emergence would be inexplicable” (NFRS, 103). He argues that developments in artificial intelligence, which are often used to support materialism, actually provide an argument against materialism. For if it is possible to program computers to perform complex functions akin to human behavior without being conscious, then again “consciousness becomes functionless and inexplicable” (NFRS, 101). Assuming that it is more likely that consciousness would emerge if it offered an evolutionary advantage of some kind, he judges epiphenomenalism to be nearly as implausible as mind/brain identity.

After rejecting materialist views of the mind, Hick posits a “non-Cartesian dualism” in which the mind “exists as a non-physical reality in continual interaction with the brain” (NFRS, 111). He believes that this kind of dualism better accounts for nondeterministic or libertarian free will, which he finds entirely more philosophically defensible than compatibilist freedom—the latter of which Hick considers to be self-defeating at best and “an example of philosophical spin doctoring” at worst (NFRS, 112).

Hick summarizes his argument for the possibility of religious experience, stating, “The human person is more than a physical organism, and it cannot be excluded a priori that there may be a non-physical supra-natural reality, perhaps of the limitless significance that the religions claim, and also an answering non-physical aspect of our own nature” (NFRS, 123). He thus invokes the principle of critical trust, in which we take our experiences to be veridical unless and until there is reason to reject their veridicality. He notes that we all live by the principle of critical trust in our everyday experience of the natural world. And since he has argued that there is no a priori reason to rule out the possibility of a supra-natural reality, he concludes that we should apply the same principle of critical trust to our religious experience. One who has a religious experience can take that religious experience to be veridical unless and until there is reason for rejecting its veridicality.

3. Philosophical Theology

a. Irenaean “Soul-making” Theodicy

One of Hick’s most important contributions to philosophical theology is his “soul-making” theodicy, first presented in his work, Evil and the God of Love. He spends much of this work interacting with what he calls the traditional Augustinian type of theodicy, in which finitely perfect human beings at a remote time in history fell from perfection by using their free will to turn away from God—an act of rebellion that precipitated evil and suffering in the world. Hick finds this response to be inadequate due to its basis in a narrowly literal reading of the account of the fall found in Genesis chapter three. According to Hick, it is very difficult to take the story of Adam and Eve’s fall literally in light of the scientific evidence for evolution. Moreover, he finds the traditional view incapable of making sense of “finitely perfect creatures who fall out of the full glory and blessedness of God’s Kingdom” (Evil and the God of Love, 2d. ed. [EGL], 280). For if such a creature lived “face to face with infinite plenitude of being, limitlessly dynamic life and power, and unfathomable goodness and love, there seems to be an absurdity in the idea of his seeing rebellion as a possibility” (EGL, 278). However, if instead such a creature “does not exist in such closeness to God, but rather in a human (or angelic) world in which the divine reality is not unambiguously manifest to him,” then it seems that the circumstances are “weighted against the creature,” and sinning “is now rather more than a bare possibility” (EGL, 279). According to Hick’s understanding of the traditional Augustinian view, then, “The creature’s fall is either impossible, or else so very possible as to be excusable” (EGL, 280).

Rather than utilizing a traditional free-will defense that includes the concept of a literal fall, Hick takes an evolutionary approach to speak of humanity’s developing moral education. In contrast to the Augustinian type of theodicy that looks backward to a remote point of perfection in human history, Hick’s theodicy is decidedly eschatological—looking forward to future perfection in God’s heavenly Kingdom. Though Hick concedes that the Augustinian type has been the dominant one throughout Christian history—with advocates in the Catholic as well as the Protestant tradition—Hick finds another minority type first advocated by the Hellenistic or Eastern Fathers and then re-emerging in the nineteenth century liberal Protestant thought of Schleiermacher. Hick calls this view the Irenaean type of theodicy after the Eastern Father Irenaeus in whom Hick finds the germ of his theodicy. According to the Irenaean type, humans were not created in a perfected state in an idyllic environment but are rather in a continuous process of creation or development from morally immature creatures to morally perfected ones. God thus created the world—with all its potential evil and suffering—to serve as a “vale of soul-making.” Hick states that “it is an ethically reasonable judgment.... that human goodness slowly built up through personal histories of moral effort has a value in the eyes of the Creator which justifies even the long travail of the soul-making process” (EGL, 256). He argues further,

Men are not to be thought of on the analogy of animal pets, whose life is to be made as agreeable as possible, but rather on the analogy of human children, who are to grow to adulthood in an environment whose primary and overriding purpose is not immediate pleasure but the realizing of the most valuable potentialities of human personality. (EGL, 258)

According to Hick, the story of the human fall is a mythological way of describing the present human situation. Humans are given a certain level of autonomy from their creator in virtue of being created at an “epistemic distance” from God. It is possible for humans to know God, but they can only do so by freely exercising a faith-response, which for Hick consists “in an uncompelled interpretive activity whereby we experience the world as mediating the divine presence” (EGL, 281). Humans are cognitively free to live as if the natural world is all that is, but those who interpret the world religiously by responding to God in faith can be slowly developed into the likeness of God.

Hick acknowledges a number of comparisons between the Augustinian type of theodicy and his Irenaean soul-making type of theodicy, such as God’s share in the responsibility for the existence of evil, but he finds the Irenaean type more plausible and theologically satisfying. According to Hick, the Augustinian type is often too impersonal and is undermined by its view of the destiny of humanity divided between the pleasures of heaven and the torments of hell. In contrast, the Irenaean type of theodicy offers the hope “that God will eventually succeed in His purpose of winning all men to Himself in faith and love” (EGL, 342).

Later developments in Hick’s theology and philosophy of religion caused him to back away from taking his soul-making view as an explanation of the design of a loving personal God seeking fellowship with his creatures. Thus, as Marilyn Adams notes in the forward to the 2007 reissue of Evil and the God of Love, Hick shifts from a soul-making theodicy to a soul-making soteriology. In later works, such as his Death and Eternal Life, he continues to make use of the soul-making view, but he develops it in a way that can be utilized to fit his pluralistic orientation to religions, including concepts such as reincarnation and post-mortem moral development.

b. Christology as Myth or Metaphor

In one of Hick’s most important and controversial essays, “Jesus and the World Religions,” Hick calls for a reinterpretation of Jesus’s divinity in light of modern biblical criticism and our growing awareness of religious diversity. According to Hick, “the Nicene definition of God-the-Son-incarnate is only one way of conceptualizing the lordship of Jesus, the way taken by the Graeco-Roman world of which we are the heirs;” however, “in the new age of world ecumenism which we are entering it is proper for Christians to become conscious of both the optional and the mythological character of this traditional language” (“Jesus and the World Religions” [JWR], in The Myth of God Incarnate, 168). Hick argues that the earliest understanding of Jesus expressed by his first disciples and to a large extent portrayed in the synoptic Gospels and the book of Acts is that of a man “intensely and overwhelmingly conscious of the reality of God” (JWR, 172). Because of Jesus’s intimate relationship with God, he possessed a stunning spiritual authority that included the ability to forgive sins, heal diseases, and speak on behalf of God. Jesus was thus given honorific titles by his followers, such as Messiah, Lord, and Son of God. Over time these poetic images attributed to Jesus took on more than the symbolic or metaphorical value in which they were originally intended and instead became metaphysical statements. Hick finds this development already in the Gospel of John and finally formalized in the two-natures Christology of Nicea and Chalcedon.

According to Hick, the two-natures view of Jesus as fully human and fully divine is deficient in at least three ways. First, it misreads the original poetic intent of Jesus’s divine titles, transposing “a metaphorical son of God to a metaphysical God the Son” (JWR, 176). Second, Hick argues that the two-natures view is itself unintelligible. In a now famous quote, he states, “For to say, without explanation, that the historical Jesus of Nazareth was also God is as devoid of meaning as to say that this circle drawn with a pencil on paper is also a square” (JWR, 178). Finally, he argues that a literal understanding of Jesus as the Son of God requires a restrictive view of the authentic religious life as contained exclusively within the Christian tradition. In contrast, by understanding Christological language as mythological, we can affirm that the Logos of God was working in the person of Jesus of Nazareth just as it has worked “in various ways within the Indian, the semitic, the Chinese, the African.... forms of life” (JWR, 181). Hick believes that such an understanding of Jesus will not diminish but will increase his importance in the global religious life.

c. Death and Afterlife

Hick’s Death and Eternal Life stands as one of the few substantial constructive works in pluralistic philosophy of religion or what he calls “global theology.” His expansive treatment of the topic includes discussion of historical views, contemporary philosophical views, humanist views, the contributions of biology, psychology, and parapsychology, and Western and Eastern religious views, including Catholic, Protestant, Vedantic Hindu, and Buddhist thought. Hick argues that there is no good reason to rule out the existence of an afterlife a priori. He rejects naturalistic views of the human person, including mind/brain identity and epiphenomenal views, and argues that the evidence from parapsychology—which he believes is more formidable than is often acknowledged—points to “the independent reality of mind and brain, as mutually interacting entities or processes” and “considerably decreases the a priori improbability of the survival of the mind after the death of the body” (Death and Eternal Life [DEL], 126).

Hick takes a decidedly empirical stance toward views of the afterlife from the various world religions. He invokes the principle of openness to all data, attempting to withhold any bias for or against any particular view. What results is a philosophical evaluation of the Western idea of the survival of a disembodied mind or soul, the semitic/Western idea of bodily resurrection, and the Eastern concepts of reincarnation and rebirth. Hick argues for the possibility of each of these views and examines each for internal consistency and explanatory value. For example, he argues that the popular conception of reincarnation or rebirth in which an individual person literally inhabits a number of successive human bodies “has limited support from the alleged memories of former lives.... but tends to be unconvincing to those outside these cultures, and indeed seems to be slowly losing its hold even within them” (DEL, 392). On the other hand, the more sophisticated understanding of reincarnation, in which a “higher self” or karmic package produces a series of persons, may be true but “lacks the moral and practical significance of the more popular pictures of reincarnation” (DEL, 392).

To argue for the logical possibility of a post-mortem bodily resurrection, Hick offers what he calls the “replica” theory. He explains this theory with a thought experiment that proceeds in three stages. In the first stage a person suddenly disappears in London and an exact “replica” of him reappears in New York. Hick argues that after examining the person in New York, we would find that “there is everything that would lead us to identify the one who appeared with the one who disappeared, except continuous occupancy in space” (DEL, 280). In the second stage of the thought experiment, a person in London suddenly dies and an exact “replica” appears in New York. Hick argues that even if we had the corpse of the person who died in London, we would still eventually conclude—after interaction with the person in New York—that the person who appeared in New York is the same person as the one who died in London. Finally, in the third stage of the thought experiment, the person dies in London and an exact “replica” appears “in a different world altogether, a resurrection world inhabited by resurrected ‘replicas’ – this world occupying its own space distinct from the space with which we are familiar” (DEL, 285). Again, Hick argues that the “replica” in the other world would be considered the same person as the person who died in London. In order to avoid confusion, he uses the term “replica” in quotes to indicate his special use of the term. The point of the quote marks around “replica” is that these are not ordinary replicas, of which there can be many of the same individual, but “replicas” of which there can by definition only be one of each individual. He concludes that as bizarre as these cases may be, they support the logical possibility of bodily resurrection. He does not necessarily endorse the “replica” view but uses it as a helpful way of understanding the idea of post-mortem bodily resurrection expressed in Jewish and Christian thought.

Hick’s primary constructive contribution to the philosophical discussion of the afterlife is his distinction between eschatologies, which describe the final state, and pareschatologies, which describe the state between death and the eschaton. By making such a distinction, he is able to combine multiple religious and philosophical conceptions of the afterlife into his afterlife hypothesis. According to his hypothesis, which he posits tentatively, the state immediately upon death “is subjective and dream-like” and thus can take the form of the expectation of the deceased person (DEL, 416). Since the immediate post-mortem state is shaped partly by the person’s expectations, the devoted Christian may find herself before the throne of final judgment, while the secularist might have a dream-like experience largely continuous with her earthly life. However, because Hick believes that life is a continuous soul-making process and that most of us have not completed that process at death, he hypothesizes that our earthly life may be “the first of a series of limited phases of existence, each bounded by its own ‘death’” (DEL, 408). Unlike traditional reincarnation views, though, Hick believes that each new life will be lived in a new world with its own unique opportunities to continue in the soul-making process toward one’s ultimate perfection.

Finally, Hick proposes very tentatively that the final state, or eschaton, will include all of humanity in a perfected state of unity with each other and with the Transcendent Reality. Hick considers this view to be expressive of the “point towards which the more eastern aspects of traditional western thought seem to converge with the more western aspects of traditional eastern thought” (DEL, 459). In contrast to traditional Western religious views, Hick rejects the notion of the immortal ego. But in contrast to traditional Eastern religious views, he also rejects the idea of complete personal extinction or absorption. Rather,

What Christians call the Mystical Body of Christ within the life of God, and Hindus the universal Atman which we all are, and Mahayana Buddhists the self-transcending unity in the Dharma Body of the Buddha, consists of the wholeness of ultimately perfected humanity beyond the existence of separate egos. (DEL, 464)

Thus, at the completion of the long soul-making process, each person will maintain her individual identity which will be completely void of any “ego-aspect,” having been filled instead with “the unselfish love which the New Testament calls agape” (DEL, 464).

4. Religious Pluralism

a. Religious Ambiguity

Hick’s pluralistic hypothesis is based on the notion that the world is religiously ambiguous, such that it can be experienced either religiously or non-religiously, with no compelling proofs for or against any one religious or nonreligious interpretation of the world. Hick first introduced the notion of religious ambiguity in Faith and Knowledge, though at that time he applied it solely to the ambiguity between theistic and atheistic interpretations of the world rather than drawing out its fuller implications for religious pluralism. Nevertheless, the epistemological ideas in Faith and Knowledge such asexperiencing-as” and “religious interpretation” become the foundation for his pluralistic hypothesis, which he develops most fully in An Interpretation of Religion, based on his 1986-87 Gifford Lectures. There he argues not only that the world is sufficiently ambiguous to allow it to be interpreted religiously in different ways but also that there is parity among each of the major world religions regarding their soteriological and ethical efficacy. As far as can be judged by human observation, no one religion stands out above the rest in terms of its ability to transform lives. Moreover, no one religion can lay claim to being the only context for authentic religious experiences. Once one accepts Hick’s epistemological justification for one’s own religious experience, one must be willing to grant the same epistemological justification for those who form their own quite different religious beliefs based on their religious experiences. Thus Hick proposes his pluralistic hypothesis in which each world faith is viewed as a separate culturally conditioned way in which the Ultimate Reality can be experienced. As he states, “These traditions are accordingly to be regarded as alternative soteriological ‘spaces’ within which, or ‘ways’ along which, men and women can find salvation/liberation/ultimate fulfilment” (An Interpretation of Religion, 2d. ed. [IR], 240).

b. Kantian Phenomenal/Noumenal Distinction and the Transcategorial Real

In developing his pluralistic hypothesis, Hick relies heavily on Kant’s distinction between the phenomenal and the noumenal, where the former is the world as humanly experienced and the latter is the world an sich, as it is in itself. Hick applies this model directly to the religious Ultimate, distinguishing between the Real as humanly experienced and the Real an sich. For Hick, the personal gods described by the various religions, such as Yahweh, the Trinity, Allah, Shiva and Vishnu are experienced at the phenomenal level, as are the non-personal depictions of the religious ultimate which are characteristic of Eastern religions, such as the Absolute, Brahman and Dharmakaya. The concepts of personae and impersonae are based on our phenomenological experiences of the Real; however, such descriptions cannot be literally applied to the Real an sich, which is transcategorial or ineffable. As Hick states, the Real an sich “cannot be said to be one or many, person or thing, substance or process, good or evil, purposive or non-purposive” (IR, 246). Only purely formal categories can be applied to the Real an sich, such as, for example, that it is the ground of our religious experience. In order for religious experiences to be veridical—which Hick argues for at length—he posits the Real an sich as “the necessary postulate of the pluralistic religious life of humanity” (IR, 249). In other words, in order to avoid the extremes of religious exclusivism, where only one religion accurately describes the Real, and religious non-realism, where all religious experience is based on human projection, Hick posits the transcategorial Real as the ground for all authentic religious experience, though the Real in itself is not describable by any one religion.

c. Soteriological and Ethical Criteria

Hick argues that the primary function or goal of each of the major world religions in their various ways is “the transformation of human existence from self-centredness to Reality-centeredness” (IR, 300). According to his pluralistic hypothesis, human salvation is defined by this very transformation. Thus, in order to evaluate the various religions, one must examine their respective abilities to bring about this transformation. By Hick’s estimation, each of the major world religions has produced its own share of saints who exemplify the transformation from self-centeredness to Reality-centeredness. Moreover, “what has happened to a striking extent in the saints has also been happening in lesser degrees to innumerable others within the same traditions” (IR, 307). Therefore, the major world religions should all be judged as authentic soteriological paths. Hick argues further that such transformation is not coincidental but attests to the ethical core of the major world religions, encompassed in the Golden Rule. He finds similarly stated ethical principles in the scriptures and teachings of each of the major world religions but also points to aspects of the various religions that deviate from this ethical core. As he states, “Taking the great world traditions as totalities, then, we can only say that each is an unique mixture of good and evil” (IR, 337). Therefore, as a practical outworking of his pluralistic hypothesis, Hick argues that those doctrines and dogmas of the various religions that do not cohere with the common ethical ideal should be purified from the religions by their respective adherents.

d. Religious Language as Mythological

Since Hick holds that the Real is ultimately transcategorial, ineffable, or mysterious, he posits that all religious language, or language about the Real, is mythological rather than literal. Such mythological language is language that “is not literally true but nevertheless tends to evoke an appropriate dispositional attitude” toward the Real (IR, 348). His application of this mythological language to Christology is perhaps the most well known and controversial, but Hick also proposes similar applications to theological doctrines of each of the various religions, and indeed, to his own theodicy.

5. Criticisms and Influences

Because Hick was such a highly original thinker, whose work fits into neither the established orthodoxies of conservative Christianity nor of philosophical naturalism, his work has been both widely influential and widely criticized. Hick writes in his Autobiography that he has been “attacked from different quarters as anti-Christian, as too narrowly Christian, as an atheist, a polytheist, a postmodernist, and as not postmodernist enough!” (321). While virtually all the ideas he has proposed, including eschatological verification, “replica” theory, epistemic distance, and soul-making have been subject to scrutiny in countless articles and sometimes books, it is his pluralistic hypothesis and its resulting implications for Christian theology which have received the heaviest criticisms by far. Many of these criticisms have been largely theological, but there have been a number of substantial philosophical criticisms as well. For example, William Rowe, Alvin Plantinga, Keith Yandell, George Mavrodes, and others have argued that Hick’s Kantian distinction—as well as his related notion of transcategoriality or ineffability—is philosophically untenable. Mavrodes takes Hick’s phenomenal/noumenal distinction at face value and asks why this does not amount to polytheism, since “all the gods [of the various world religions] are real in the same sense that cantaloupes are real on the Kantian view” (“Polytheism,” in The Philosophical Challenge of Religious Diversity, 147, italics original). Rowe and Plantinga each argue that for every set of contradictory properties, one of them must literally apply to the Real. So, for example, Plantinga argues that between the logically contradictory properties of being or not being a tricycle, the latter is literally true of the Real. Likewise, Plantinga and Yandell each argue that if the Real is in fact ineffable, then it could not serve as the explanatory ground for religious experience. If it is beyond the distinction between good and evil, why believe that it is the ground of moral development rather than moral degradation? Hick has responded to these and other criticisms in his introduction to the second edition of An Interpretation of Religion and has published the back and forth conversations with a number of his critics in his Dialogues in the Philosophy of Religion.

Though Hick’s work has faced some of the strongest criticisms from more traditionally orthodox Christians, he also had a strong influence among this group. Many of his former students are now established Christian philosophers in their own right, including Steven T. Davis, William Lane Craig, and Harold A. Netland. Moreover, his more orthodox contemporary, William Alston, has credited Hick’s Faith and Knowledge as a major influence on his widely influential epistemology of religious experience. However, Hick’s most indelible influence comes not in the form of individual scholars or schools of thought but in the fruit of his efforts to revive philosophy of religion as an academically viable field at a time when it had all but died. The renaissance of philosophy of religion today owes a great debt to Hick’s work in the 1950s-70s, when theism was still very much on the defensive due to the legacy of logical positivism and the impact of the later work of Wittgenstein. It was within this hostile environment that Hick took the tools of analytic philosophy and aggressively defended the rationality of religious practices. Moreover, at a time when philosophy of religion was still dominated by Western theistic discussions, Hick introduced religious diversity as a serious philosophical topic. Today no serious discussion of religious language, religious epistemology, the problem of evil, Christology, or religious pluralism can ignore Hick’s influence.

6. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • John Hick, An Autobiography. Oxford: Oneworld, 2002.
    • With the help of his personal journals, Hick recounts his life and career.
  • John Hick, An Interpretation of Religion: Human Responses to the Transcendent, 2d. ed. New Haven: Yale University Press, 2004 (1989).
    • Based on his 1986-87 Gifford Lectures, offers his most comprehensive work in the philosophy of religion, including extended discussion on religious epistemology and religious pluralism.
  • John Hick, Death and Eternal Life. Louisville: Westminster/John Knox, 1994 (London: Collins, 1976).
    • A substantial treatment of the afterlife from a multi-disciplinary, multi-faith perspective.
  • John Hick, Dialogues in the Philosophy of Religion. New York: Palgrave, 2001.
    • Presents Hick’s dialogues over the years with philosophers and theologians, including Alvin Plantinga, William Alston, D. Z. Phillips, and Paul Knitter, among others.
  • John Hick, Disputed Questions in Theology and the Philosophy of Religion. New Haven: Yale University Press, 1993.
    • A shorter treatment of Hick’s views in religious epistemology, Christology, religious pluralism, and the afterlife.
  • John Hick, Evil and the God of Love, 2d. ed. New York: Palgrave Macmillan, 2007 (1966).
    • First published in 1966, offers the main presentation of Hick’s soul-making theodicy.
  • John Hick, Faith and Knowledge, 2d. ed. Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1966 (1957).
    • Based on his dissertation, this first book of Hick’s presents his experiential account of Christian faith.
  • John Hick, God Has Many Names. Philadelphia: Westminster, 1982.
    • A shorter, less technical discussion of Hick’s pluralistic hypothesis.
  • John Hick, “Jesus and the World Religions.” In The Myth of God Incarnate, ed. John Hick. Philadelphia: Westminster, 1977, 167-85.
    • A clear and concise explanation of Hick’s mythological understanding of Christology.
  • John Hick, The New Frontier of Religion and Science: Religious Experience, Neuroscience and the Transcendent. New York: Palgrave Macmillan, 2006.
    • Recalling many of the themes from Hick’s work, addresses the challenge of neuroscience for religious experience and belief.

b. Secondary Sources

  • William P. Alston, Perceiving God: The Epistemology of Religious Experience. Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1991.
    • A technical defense of religious experience that acknowledges Hick’s Faith and Knowledge as a major influence.
  • Lance Ashdown. Anonymous Skeptics: Swinburne, Hick, and Alston. Tübingen: Mohr Siebeck, 2002.
    • A technical, critical evaluation of Hick’s religious epistemology from a Wittgensteinian perspective.
  • Douglas Geivett, Evil and the Evidence for God: The Challenge of John Hick’s Theodicy. Philadelphia: Temple University Press, 1995.
    • An evaluation of Hick’s soul-making theodicy by an evangelical philosopher.
  • Harold Hewitt, ed. Problems in the Philosophy of Religion: Critical Studies of the Work of John Hick. London: Macmillan, 1991.
    • A collection of essays by leading philosophers of religion, including Gavin D’Costa, William Rowe, Linda Zagzebski, and Steven Davis, among others, with responses by Hick.
  • Chad Meister, Introducing Philosophy of Religion. New York: Routledge, 2009.
    • A highly readable textbook that offers a good introduction to Hick’s pluralistic hypothesis, as well as Hick’s soul-making theodicy and religious epistemology.
  • Harold Netland. Encountering Religious Pluralism: The Challenge to Christian Faith & Mission. Downers Grove, Ill.: InterVarsity, 2001.
    • An evangelical response to Hick’s pluralistic hypothesis from one of his former students.
  • Alvin Plantinga, Warranted Christian Belief. New York: Oxford University Press, 2000.
    • A lengthy defense of specifically Christian belief that criticizes Hick’s notion of the ineffable Real and responds to his pluralistic critique of exclusive Christian belief.
  • Philip L. Quinn and Kevin Meeker, eds., The Philosophical Challenge of Religious Diversity. New York: Oxford University Press, 2000.
    • A collection of essays from philosophers and theologians from across the theological spectrum, including William Lane Craig, Keith Ward, George Mavrodes, William Alston, and others, interacting primarily with Hick’s pluralistic hypothesis.
  • Robert McKim, Religious Ambiguity and Religious Diversity. New York: Oxford University Press, 2001.
    • A monograph drawing often implicitly and sometimes explicitly on a number of Hick’s themes.
  • Arvind Sharma, ed. God, Truth and Reality. New York: St. Martin’s Press, 1993.
    • A collection of essays in honor of Hick from a host of philosophical and theological colleagues and contemporaries, including William Rowe, Masao Abe, Robert and Marilyn McCord Adams, John Cobb, Ninian Smart, and others.

Author Information

David C. Cramer
Baylor University
U. S. A.

Cheng Yi (1033—1107)

Cheng Yi was one of the leading philosophers of Neo-Confucianism in the Song (Sung dynasty (960-1279). Together with his elder brother Cheng Hao (1032-1085), he strove to restore the tradition of Confucius and Mencius in the name of “the study of dao” (dao xue), which eventually became the main thread of Neo-Confucianism. Despite diverse disagreements between them, the two brothers are usually lumped together as the Cheng Brothers to signify their common contribution to Neo-Confucianism.

Cheng Yi asserted a transcendental principle (li) as an ontological substance. It is a principle that accounts for both the existence of nature and morality. He also asserted that human nature is identical with li and is originally good. The way of moral cultivation for Cheng Yi is through composure and extension of knowledge which is a gradual way towards sagehood. These ideas deviate from his brother’s philosophy as well as from Mencius’. They were developed into a school for the study of li (li xue), as a rival to the study of the mind (xin xue), which was initiated by Cheng Hao and inherited by Lu Xiangshan (1139-1193) and Wang Yangming (1472-1529). Cheng Yi’s thought had a great impact on Zhu Xi (1130-1200).

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Work
  2. Ontology
  3. Philosophy of Human Nature, Mind, and Emotion
    1. Human Nature and Human Feeling
    2. The Mind
  4. The Source of Evil
  5. Moral Cultivation
    1. Living with Composure
    2. Investigating Matters
    3. The Relation between Composure and Extension of Knowledge
  6. The Influence of Cheng Yi
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Life and Work

Cheng Yi, a native of Henan, was born into a family of distinguished officials. He used Zhengshu as courtesy name, but was much better known as Yichuan, the river in his home country. Cheng Yi grew up in Huangpo, where his father served as a local administrator. At fourteen, he and his elder brother were sent to study under the tutelage of Zhou Dunyi, the Song Dynasty’s founding father of Neo-Confucianism. At eighteen, driven by a strong sense of duty and concern for the nation, , he memorialized to the emperor a penetrating analysis of the current political crisis as well as the hardships of the common people. In 1056, led by his father, he and his brother traveled to Loyang, the capital, and enrolled in the imperial academy. There they made friends with Zhang Zai, who also eventually became a paragon of Neo-Confucianism.

With an excellent essay, Cheng Yi won the commendation of Hu Yuan, the influential educator, and he gained celebrity status in academia. Young scholars came to study with him from regions far and wide. In 1072, when Cheng Hao was dismissed from his government office, Cheng Yi organized a school with him and started his life-long career as a private tutor. Time and again he turned down offers of appointment in the officialdom. Nonetheless, he maintained throughout his life a concern for state affairs and was forthright in his strictures against certain government policies, particularly those from the reform campaign of Wang Anshi. As the reformers were ousted in 1085, Cheng Yi was invited by the emperor to give political lectures regularly. He did so for twenty months, until political attacks put an end to his office.

At the age of sixty, Cheng Yi drafted a book on the Yizhuan (Commentary on the Book of Changes) and laid plans for its revision and publication in ten years. In 1049, he finished the revision complete with a foreword. He then turned to annotate the Lunyu (Analects), the Mengzi (Mencius), the Liji (Record of Ritual) and the Chunqiu (Spring and Autumn Annals). In the following year he began working on the Chunqiu Zhuan (Commentary on Spring and Autumn Annals). However, in 1102, as the reformers regained control, he was impeached on charges of “evil speech.” As a result, he was prohibited from teaching, and his books were banned and destroyed. In 1109 he suffered a stroke. Sensing the imminent end of his life, he ignored the restriction on teaching and delivered lectures on his book Yizhuan. He died in September of that year.

Apart from the book mentioned above, Cheng Yi left behind essays, poems and letters. These are collected in Works of the Cheng Brothers (Er Cheng Ji), which also carries his conversations as recorded by his disciples. Works of the Cheng Brothers is an amended version of Complete Works of the Two Chengs (the earliest version was published during the Ming dynasty), which includes Literary Remains (Yishu), Additional Works (Waishu), Explanation of Classics (Jingshuo), Collections of Literary Works (Wenyi), Commentary on the Book of Change (Zhouyi Zhuan) and Selected Writings (Cuiyan). Reflections on Things at Hand (Jinsi lu) which was compiled by Zhu Xi (1130-1200) and Lu Zuqian (1137-1181), also collected many of Cheng Yi’s conversations.

2. Ontology

The concept of li is central to Cheng Yi’s ontology. Although not created by the Cheng brothers, it attained a core status in Neo-Confucianism through their advocacy. Thus, Neo-Confucianism is also called the study of li (li xue). The many facets of li are translatable in English as “principle,” “pattern,” “reason,” or “law.” Sometimes it was used by the Chengs as synonymous with dao, which means the path. When so used, it referred to the path one should follow from the moral point of view. Understood as such, li plays an action-guiding role similar to that of moral laws. Apart from the moral sense, li also signifies the ultimate ground for all existence. This does not mean that li creates all things, but rather that li plays some explanatory role in making them the particular sorts of things they are. Therefore, li provides a principle for every existence. While Cheng Yi was aware that different things have different principles to account for their particular existence, he thought that these innumerable principles amounted to one principle. This one principle is the ultimate transcendental ground of all existence, which Zhu Xi later termed taiji (“great ultimate”) – the unitary basis of the dynamic, diverse cosmos. While the ultimate principle possesses the highest universality, the principle for a certain existence represents the specific manifestation of this ultimate principle. Therefore the latter can be understood as a particularization of the former.

Apparently for Cheng Yi, li is both the principle for nature and that for morality. The former governs natural matters; the latter, human affairs. To illustrate this with Cheng’s example, li is the principle by which fire is hot and water is cold. It is also the principle that regulates the relation between father and son, requiring that the father be paternal and the son be filial.

As the principle of morality, li is ontologically prior to human affairs. It manifests itself in an individual affair in a particular situation. Through one’s awareness, pre-existent external li develops into an internal principle within the human heart-mind (xin). On the other hand, as the principle of nature, li is also ontologically prior to a multitude of things. It manifests itself in the vital force (qi) of yin-yang. The relationship between li and yin-yang is sometimes misconstrued as one of identity or coextensivity, but Cheng Yi’s description of the relationship between the two clearly indicates otherwise.For him, li is not the same thing as yin-yang, but rather is what brings about the alternation or oscillation between yin and yang. Although li and qi belong to two different realms -- namely, the realm “above form” (xing er shang) and the realm “below form” (xing er xia) -- they cannot exist apart from one another. He clearly stated that, apart from yin-yang, there is no dao.

In summary, no matter whether as the principle of nature or that of morality, li serves as an expositional principle which accounts for what is and what should be from an ontological perspective. Therefore, as Mou Zongsan argued, for Cheng Yi, li does not represent an ever producing force or activity, as his brother Cheng Hao perceived, but merely an ontological ground for existence in the realm of nature as well as morality.

3. Philosophy of Human Nature, Mind, and Emotion

a. Human Nature and Human Feeling

Human nature (xing) has been a topic of controversy since Mencius championed the view that human nature is good (xing shan). The goodness of human nature in this sense is called the “original good,” which signifies the capacity of being compassionate and distinguishing between the good and the bad. Cheng Yi basically adopted Mencius’ view on this issue and further provided an ontological ground for it. He claimed that human nature and dao are one, thus human nature is equivalent to li. Human nature is good since dao and li are absolute good, from which moral goodness is generated. In this way Cheng Yi elevated the claim that human nature is good to the level of an ontological claim, which was not so explicit in Mencius.

According to Cheng Yi, all actions performed from human nature are morally good. Presenting itself in different situations, human nature shows the different aspects of li -- namely, humanity (ren), righteousness (yi), propriety (li), wisdom (qi), and trustworthiness (xin). (These five aspects of li also denote five aspects of human nature.) Human beings are able to love since ren is inherent in their nature. When the heart-mind of compassion is generated from ren, love will arise. Nevertheless, love belongs to the realm of feeling (qing) and therefore it is not human nature. (Neo-Confucians tended to regard human feelings as responses of human nature to external things.) Cheng Yi argued that we can be aware of the principle of ren inherent in us by the presentation of the heart-mind of compassion. Loyalty (zhong) and empathy (shu) are only feelings and, thus, they are not human nature. Because of ren, human beings are able to love, be loyal and be empathetic. Nevertheless, to love, in Cheng Yi’s words, is only the function (yong) of ren and to be empathetic is its application.

As a moral principle inherent in human nature, ren signifies impartiality. When one is practicing ren, one acts impartially, among other things. Ren cannot present itself but must be embodied by a person. Since love is a feeling, it can be right or wrong. It may be said that ren is the principle to which love should conform. In contrast to Cheng Hao’s theory that ren represents an ever producing and reproducing force, ren for Cheng Yi is only a static moral principle.

Ren, understood as a moral principle that has the same ontological status as li or dao, is a substance (ti) while feeling of compassion or love is a function. Another function of ren consists in filial piety (xiao) and fraternal duty (ti). These have been regarded by Chinese people as cardinal virtues since the time of the early Zhou dynasty. It was claimed in the Analects that filial piety and fraternal duty are the roots of ren. However, Cheng Yi gave a re-interpretation by asserting that filial piety and fraternal duty are the roots of practicing ren. Again, this shows that for Cheng Yi, ren is a principle, and filial piety and fraternal duty are only two of the ways of actualizing it. When one applies ren to the relationship of parents and children, one will act as filial, and to the relationship between siblings, one will act fraternally. Moreover, Cheng Yi considered filial piety and fraternal duty the starting points of practicing ren.

Having said that ren is substance whereas love, filial piety, and fraternal duty are its functions, it should be noted that according to Cheng Yi the substance cannot activate itself and reveal its function. The application of ren mentioned above merely signifies that the mind and feeling of a person should conform to ren in dealing with various relationships or situations. This is what the word “static” used in the previous paragraph means. Thus understood, ren as an aspect of human nature deviates from Mencius’ perception, as well as the perception in The Doctrine of the Mean (Zhong Yong) and the Commentary of the Book of Change, as Mou Zongsan pointed out. Mou also argued that the three sources mentioned have formed a tradition of understanding dao both as a substance and as an activity. Not surprisingly, Cheng Yi’s view on human nature and li is quite different from his brother Cheng Hao’s.

By the same token, other aspects in human nature such as righteousness, propriety, wisdom and trustworthiness are mere principles of different human affairs. One should seek conformity with these principles in dealing with issues in ordinary life.

b. Mind

The duality of li and qi in Cheng Yi’s ontology also finds expression in his ethics, resulting in the tripartite division of human nature, human mind and human feeling. In Cheng Yi’s ethics, the mind of a human being does not always conform to his nature; therefore a human sometimes commits morally bad acts. This is due to the fact that human nature belongs to the realm of li and the mind and feelings belong to the realm of qi. Insofar as the human mind is possessed by desires which demand satisfaction, it is regarded as dangerous. Although ontologically speaking li and qi are not separable, desires and li contradict one another. Cheng Yi stressed that only when desires are removed can li be restored. When this happens, Cheng maintained, the mind will conform to li, and it will transform from a human mind (ren xin) to a mind of dao (dao xin). Therefore, human beings should cultivate the human mind in order to facilitate the above transformation. For Cheng Hao, however, li is already inherent in one’s heart-mind, and one only needs to activate one’s heart-mind for it to be in union with li. The mind does not need to seek conformity with li to become a single entity, as Cheng Yi suggested. It is evident that the conception of the mind in Cheng Yi’s ethics also differs from that in Mencius’ thought. Mencius considered the heart-mind as the manifestation of human nature, and if the former is fully activated, the latter will be fully actualized. For Mencius, the two are identical. Yet for Cheng Yi, li is identical with human nature but lies outside the mind. This difference of the two views later developed into two schools in Neo-Confucianism: the study of li (li xue) and the study of xin (xin xue). The former was initiated by Cheng Yi and developed by Zhu Xi and the latter was initiated by Cheng Hao and inherited by Lu Xiangshan (1139-1193) and Wang Yangming.

4. The Source of Evil

According to Cheng Yi, every being comes into existence through the endowment of qi. A person’s endowment contains various qualities of qi, some good and some bad. These qualities of qi are described in terms of their being “soft” or “hard,” “weak” or “strong,” and so forth. Since the human mind belongs to the realm of qi, it is liable to be affected by the quality of qi, and evil (e) will arise from the endowment of unbalanced and impure allotments of qi.

Qi is broadly used to account for one’s innate physical and mental characteristics. Apart from qi, the native endowment (cai) would also cause evil. Compared to qi, cai is more specific and refers to a person’s capacity for both moral and non-moral pursuits. Cai is often translated as “talent.” It influences a person’s moral disposition as well as his personality. Zhang Zai coined a term “material nature” (qizhi zhi xing), to describe this natural endowment. Although Cheng Yi adopted the concept of material nature, A.C. Graham noted that the term appeared only once in the works of the Cheng Brothers as a variant for xingzhi zhi xing. Nevertheless, this variant has superseded the original reading in many texts. Cheng Yi thought that native endowment would incline some people to be good and others to be bad from early childhood. He used an analogy to water in order to illustrate this idea: some water flows all the way to the sea without becoming dirty, but some flows only a short distance and becomes extremely turbid. Yet the water is the same. Similarly, the native endowment of qi could be pure or not. However, Cheng Yi emphasized that although the native endowment is a constraint on ordinary people transforming, they still have the power to override this endowment as long as they are not self-destructive (zibao) or in self-denial (ziqi). Cheng Yi admitted that the tendency to be self-destructive or in self-denial is also caused by the native endowment. However, since such people possess the same type of human nature as any others, they can free themselves from being self-destructive or in self-denial. Consequently Cheng Yi urged people to make great efforts to remove the deviant aspects of qi which cause the bad native endowment and to nurture one’s qi to restore its normal state. Once qi is adjusted, no native endowment will go wrong.

As mentioned in the previous section, Cheng Yi maintained that human desires are also the origin of selfishness, which leads to evil acts. The desires which give rise to moral badness need not be a self-indulgent kind. Since they are by nature partial, one will err if one is activated by desire. Any intention with the slightest partiality will obscure one’s original nature; even the “flood-like qi” described by Mencius (Mengzi 2A2) will collapse. The ultimate aim of moral practice is then to achieve sagehood where one will do the obligatory things naturally without any partial intention.

The Cheng brothers wrote, “It lacks completeness to talk about human nature without referring to qi and it lacks illumination to talk about qi without referring to human nature.” Cheng Yi’s emphasis on the influence of qi on the natural moral dispositions well reflects this saying. He put considerable weight on the endowment of qi; nevertheless, the latter by no means playsa deterministic role in moral behavior.

5. Moral Cultivation

a. Living with Composure

For Cheng Yi, to live with composure (ju jing) is one of the most important ways for cultivating the mind in order to conform with li. Jing appeared in the Analects as a virtue, which Graham summarized as “the attitude one assumes towards parents, ruler, spirits; it includes both the emotion of reverence and a state of self-possession, attentiveness, concentration.” It is often translated as “reverence” or “respect.” Hence in the Analects, respect is a norm which requires one to collect oneself and be attentive to a person or thing. Respect necessarily takes a direct object. Cheng Yi interpreted jing as the unity of the mind, and Graham proposed “composure” as the translation. As Graham put it, for Cheng Yi, composure means “making unity the ruler of the mind” (zhu yi). What is meant by unity is to be without distraction. In Cheng Yi’s own words, if the mind goes neither east nor west, then it will remain in equilibrium. When one is free from distraction, one can avoid being distressed by confused thoughts. Cheng Yi said that unity is called sincerity (cheng). To preserve sincerity one does not need to pull it in from outside. Composure and sincerity come from within. One only needs to make unity the ruling consideration, and then sincerity will be preserved. If one cultivates oneself according to this way, eventually li will become plain. Understood as such, composure is a means for nourishing the mind. Cheng Yi clearly expressed that being composed is the best way for a human being to enter into dao.

Cheng Yi urged the learner to cultivate himself by “being composed and thereby correcting himself within.” Furthermore, he indicated that merely by controlling one’s countenance and regulating one’s thought, composure will come spontaneously. It is evident that controlling one’s countenance and regulating one’s thought is an empirical way of correcting oneself within. Such a way matches the understanding of the mind as an empirical mind which belongs to qi. Mou Zongsan pointed out that this way of cultivating the empirically composed mind is quite different from Mencius’ way of moral cultivation. For the latter, the cultivation aims at the awareness of the moral heart-mind, a substance identical with Heaven. Since the mind and li are not identical in Cheng Yi’s philosophy, they are two entities even though one has been cultivating one’s mind for a long time, and what one can hope to achieve is merely always to be in conformity with li.

b. Investigating Matters

To achieve the ultimate goal of apprehending li, Cheng Yi said, one should extend one’s knowledge (zhi zhi) by investigating matters (ge wu). The conception of extending knowledge by investigating matters originates from the Great Learning (Da Xue), where the eight steps of practicing moral cultivation by the governor who wanted to promote morality throughout the kingdom were illustrated. Cheng Yi expounded the idea in “the extension of knowledge lies in the investigation of things” in the Great Learning by interpreting the key words in “the investigation of matters.” The word “investigation” (ge) means “arrive at” and “matters” (wu) means “events.” He maintained that in all events there are principles (li) and to arrive at those principles is ge wu. No matter whether the events are those that exist in the world or within human nature, it is necessary to investigate their principles to the utmost. That means one should, for instance, investigate the principle by which fire is hot and that by which water is cold, also the principles embodied in the relations between ruler and minister, father and son, and the like. Thus understood, the investigation of things is also understood as exhausting the principles (qiong li). Cheng Yi emphasized that these principles are not outside of, but already within, human nature.

Since for every event there is a particular principle, Cheng Yi proposed that one should investigate each event in order to comprehend its principle. He also suggested that it is profitable to investigate one event after another, day after day, as after sufficient practice, the interrelations among the principles will be evident. Cheng Yi pointed out that there are various ways to exhaust the principles, for instance, by studying books and explaining the moral principles in them; discussing prominent figures, past and present, to distinguish what is right and wrong in their actions; experiencing practical affairs and dealing with them appropriately.

Cheng Yi rejected the idea that one should exhaust all the events in the world in order to exhaust the principles. This might appear to conflict with the proposition that one should investigate into each event, yet the proposal can be understood as “one should investigate into each event that one happens to encounter.” Cheng Yi claimed that if the principle is exhausted in one event, for the rest one can infer by analogy. This is possible is due to the fact that innumerable principles amount to one.

From the above exposition of Cheng Yi’s view on the investigations of matters, the following implication can be made. First, the knowledge obtained by investigating matters is not empirical knowledge. Cheng Yi was well aware of the distinction between the knowledge by observation and the knowledge of morals as initially proposed by Zhang Zai. The former is about the relations among different matters and therefore is gained by observing matters in the external world. The latter cannot be gained by observation. Since Cheng Yi said that the li exhausted by investigating matters is within human nature, it cannot be obtained by observation, and thus is not any kind of empirical knowledge.

This may be confusing, but if we compare Cheng Yi’s kind of knowledge to scientific knowledge, things may become clearer. It is important to distinguish between the means one uses to get knowledge, and the constituents of that knowledge. One uses observation as a means to better understand the nature of external things. But the knowledge one gains isn’t observational by nature. It isn’t the sort of knowledge scientists have in mind when they say “objects with mass are drawn toward one another.” It differs in at least two respects: first, the content of one’s knowledge is something we can draw from ourselves, as we have the same li in our nature; second, the knowledge we gain doesn’t rest on the authority of observations. We know it without having to put our trust in external observations, since the knowledge is drawn from inside ourselves. We only need external observation in order to liberate this internal knowledge. So we need it as a means, but no more.

Second, according to Cheng Yi, investigating matters literally means arriving at an event. It implies that the investigation is undertaken in the outside world where the mind will be in contact with the event. Only through the concrete contact with the eventis the act of knowing concretely carried out and the principles can be exhausted.

Third, Cheng Yi believed that through the investigation of matters the knowledge obtained is the knowledge of morals. When one is in contact with an event, one will naturally apprehend the particulars of the event and the knowledge by observation will thus form. Nevertheless, in order to gain the knowledge of morals one should not stick to those concrete particulars but go beyond to apprehend the transcendental principle which accounts for the nature and morals. Thus, the concrete events are only necessary means to the knowledge of morals. They themselves are not constituents of the knowledge in question, as Mou Zongsan argued.

c. The Relation between Composure and Extension of Knowledge

According to Cheng Yi, learning to be an exemplary person (junzi) lies in self-reflection. Self-reflection in turn lies in the extension of knowledge. Also, only by self-reflection can one transform the knowledge by observation into the knowledge of morals. This is possible only if the mind is cultivated in the maintenance of composure. With composure in place, one can apprehend the transcendental principles of events. Cheng Yi made a remark on this idea: “It is impossible to extend the knowledge without composure.” This also explains the role composure plays in obtaining the knowledge of morals by investigating matters.

Contrariwise, obtaining the knowledge of morals can stabilize the composed mind and regulate concrete events to be in conformity with li. Cheng Yi described this gradual stabilization of the mind by accumulating moral knowledge as “collecting righteousness (ji yi).”

Self-reflection for Cheng Yi meant cultivating the mind with composure. However, as mentioned above, the mind cannot be identical with li; it can only conform to it since they belong to two different realms. Since the knowledge obtained by the composed mind comprises the transcendental principles, the knowing in question is a kind of contemplative act. Notwithstanding that, this act still represents a subject-object mode of knowing. On the contrary, the meaning of self-reflection for Mencius reveals a different dimension. The knowledge of morals gained by self-reflection is not any principle which the mind should follow. The knowing is an awareness of the moral mind itself through which its identification with human nature and also with li is revealed. Therefore the object of knowing is not the principle out there (inherent in human nature though) but the knowing mind itself. The awareness thus is a self-awareness. The reflection understood as such is not the cognition per se; it is rather the activation of the mind. In the act of activation, the dichotomy of the knowing and the known diminishes. Moreover, when the mind is activated, human nature is actualized and li will manifest itself. Hence, the mind is aware of itself being a substance, from which li is created. Here Cheng Yi draws upon the distinction between a thing’s substance, understood as its essential and inactive state, and the active state in which it behaves in characteristic ways. Anticipating that his account of the mind will be misread as suggesting that the mind has two parts -- an active and inactive part -- Cheng Yi clarifies that he understands the two parts to be, in fact, two aspects of one and the same thing.

6. The Influence of Cheng Yi

The distinctive and influential ideas in Cheng Yi’s thought can be summarized as follows:

  1. There exists a transcendental principle (li) of nature and morality, which accounts for the existence of concrete things and also the norms to which they adhere.
  2. This principle can be apprehended by inferring from concrete things (embodied as qi) to the transcendental li.
  3. This principle is static, not active or in motion.
  4. Human nature is identical with li, but this should be distinguished from the human mind, which belongs to the realm of qi.
  5. Ren belongs to human nature and love belongs to the realm of feeling.
  6. Moral cultivation is achieved gradually, through composure and the cumulative extension of knowledge.

Cheng Yi had tremendous impact on the course of Confucian philosophy after his time. His influence is most manifest, however, in the thought of the great Neo-Confucian synthesizer Zhu Xi, who adopted and further developed the views outlined above.

7. References and Further Reading

  • Chan, Wing-tsit, trans. Reflections on Things at Hand: The Neo-Confucian Anthology Compiled by Zhu Xi and Lu Zu-qian. New York: Columbia University Press, 1967.
    • This contains selections of Cheng Yi’s work in English.
  • Cheng Hao & Cheng Yi. Complete Works of Cheng Brothers (Er Cheng Ji) (in Chinese). Beijing:Zhonghua Shuju, 1981.
    • This is the most complete work of the Cheng Brothers.
  • Graham, A.C. Two Chinese Philosophers: The Metaphysics of the Brothers Ch’êng. La Salle, Illinois: Open Court Publishing Company, 1992.
    • This is the only English monograph on the Cheng Brothers. It provides an in-depth discussion on the philosophy of Cheng Yi. The author also refers to the interpretations made by Zhu Xi.
  • Mou Zongsan (Mou Tsung-san). The Substance of Mind and the Substance of Human Nature (Xinte yu xingte) (in Chinese), vol. II. Taibei: Zhengzhong Shuju, 1968.
    • This work is famous for its extraordinary depth and incomparable clarity in the study of Neo-Confucianism of Song and Ming dynasty. It provides a historical as well as philosophical framework to understand various systems of Neo-Confucianism in that period.
  • Huang, Siu-chi. Essentials of Neo-Confucianism: Eight Major Philosophers of the Song and Ming Periods. London: Greenwood Press, 1999.
    • This book on Neo-Confucianism is clearly written and thoughtfully presented. It contains a good summary of Cheng Yi’s thought.
  • Huang, Yong. “The Cheng Brothers’ Onto-theological Articulation of Confucian Values.” Asian Philosophy 17/3 (2007): 187-211.
    • A philosophical discussion on the Cheng Brothers’ ideas of the relations between their ontology and ethics.
  • Huang, Yong. “How Weakness of Will Is Not Possible: Cheng Yi on Moral Knowledge.” In Educations and Their Purposes: Dialogues across Cultures, eds. R.T. Ames and P. Hershock (Honolulu, Hawaii: University of Hawaii Press, 2007), 429-456.
    • This article attempts to bring Cheng Yi’s concept of moral knowledge into the current discourse on weakness of will.

Author Information

Wai-ying Wong
Lingnan University
Hong Kong, China

Dai Zhen (Tai Chen, 1724—1777)

daizhenDai Zhen, also known as Dai Dongyuan (Tai Tung-yuan), was a philosopher and intellectual polymath believed by many to be the most important Confucian scholar of the Qing (Ch’ing) dynasty (1644-1911 CE). He was also the foremost figure among the sophisticated new class of career academics who rose to prominence in the mid-Qing. A prominent critic of the Confucian orthodoxy of the Song and Ming dynasties (known today in the West as “Neo-Confucianism”), Dai charged his predecessors with philosophical errors that had dire moral consequences for their adherents and brilliantly showed them to be rooted in misreadings of the Confucian classics. Chief among these errors was the tendency to understand feelings and desires as being obstacles to proper moral deliberation and action, a view that Dai saw as opening to the door to frictionless moral judgments, free of calculations of benefit or harm and not responsible to the felt responses of others. Dai aimed to restore feelings and desires to prominence by assigning a central place to sympathetic concern (shu) in moral deliberation. He thus reconceived the fundamental nature of the Neo-Confucian universe in a way that explained moral claims in terms of the human affects. He accomplished this dramatic reconfiguration of the Neo-Confucian thought against the backdrop of social institutions that showed little enthusiasm for, and sometimes outright hostility to, his philosophical endeavors.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Works
  2. Moral Agency
    1. Dai’s Critique of the Neo-Confucian Account
    2. Sympathy as a Form of Moral Deliberation
  3. Human Nature and Moral Cultivation
  4. Metaphysics and Metaethics
  5. Influence
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Life and Works

Born in 1724 to a poor cloth merchant of Anhui province, Dai Zhen emerged from an unlikely educational background, attending local schools because his father could not afford the customary private tutorials. By the time Dai was eighteen, however, his genius and scholarly accomplishment had won him the acclaim of his elders and shortly thereafter the backing of a reputable literary scholar in his own clan. Bolstered by a series of endorsements and his own evident academic success, Dai came under the tutelage of the famous classicist Jiang Yong (1681-1762), through whom he became acquainted with many figures in the thriving community of mid-Qing academics. Dai soon proved to be not just a precocious and prolific scholar but a versatile one as well. His 1753 commentary on the Poetry Classic was finished contemporaneously with his first major work in phonology, and both followed closely on the heels of a celebrated treatise in mathematics. Although Dai’s interest in philosophical topics was evident quite early, he did not finish his best-known treatises in this field of intellectual endeavor until late in life, the two most important being On the Good (Yuan Shan) and An Evidential Study of the Meaning and Terms of the Mencius (Mengzi ziyi shuzheng). Between these it is the Evidential Study that is generally regarded as his masterwork, being widely appreciated for its sophistication and rigor. By his own account, hisEvidential Study was his greatest labor of love. Several of the last years of his life were spent writing and revising it, and it is likely that he would have continued to revise the work if it were not for his untimely death 1777.

Dai became a leading figure in the dominant new philological or evidential studies (kaozheng) movement, partly because of his interest in mathematics, calendrical studies, and ancient languages and partly because of his exacting standards of argument. Yet Dais relationship to the philological movement was an uneasy one. Like other philological thinkers, he shared an interest in using hard evidence and careful exegesis to reconstruct the language and practices of the ancients. He also shared with many of them the deep conviction that the orthodox Confucianism of Zhu Xi (1130-1200), which by his time had reigned for several centuries, was thoroughly contaminated with Daoist and Buddhist ideas and needed to be corrected with the tools of evidential scholarship. But Dais contemporaries in philological studies tended to believe that the misreadings and obfuscations of orthodox Confucianism were an inevitable part of theoretical speculation about the meanings and principles (yili) of the classics. For Dai, in contrast, the purpose of evidential studies was to reconstruct the meanings and principlesincluding the ethics and metaphysicsof the Confucian canons ancient authors.

This difference of opinion regarding the study of meanings and principles appears to have led Dai to part with his philological contemporaries in two crucial ways. First, while the professional scholars of his time increasingly valued specialization in certain subfields such as astronomy or geography, Dai nevertheless remained a devoted generalist, seeing all of the various disciplines as potentially working together to reconstruct the often highly theoretical meanings of terms and moral practices contained in the classics. Second, while Dais contemporaries believed it was his contributions in fields such as phonology and mathematics that made him the most formidable scholar of his time, Dai himself believed his greatest contributions to be his treatises on such theoretical topics as human nature, metaphysics, and (especially) moral deliberation and cultivation. In his own lifetime Dais highest accolade was a prestigious position on the staff that compiled the Complete Collection of the Four Treasuries (Sikuquanshu) for the Imperial Librarya collection of classic texts that heavily favoredworks of philological interest. Admirers in Dais own era regarded his treatises on meanings and principles as a monumental waste of time, and most of his early biographers barely mentioned such work, even though it became the central focus of his thought and efforts by the end of his life. But while Dais more speculative labors may have been judged harshly in the mid-Qing, his own appraisal of his work and its importance has been vindicated by later scholars. He has come to be hailed as the foremost representative of Qing dynasty philosophy and is routinely presented as such in surveys of Chinese thought.

2. Moral Agency

a. Dai’s Critique of the Neo-Confucian Account

Dai presents his best-known philosophical work, the Evidential Study, as an indictment of Neo-Confucianism. Of particular concern to him is the reigning orthodoxy of Cheng Yi (1033-1107) and Zhu Xi (1130-1200), whose thought had been deeply embedded in China’s governing institutions for centuries, and whose very moral and metaphysical language had come into popular use. At the heart of Dai’s critique is an array of worries about the Neo-Confucian picture of moral agency, where acting well is conceived primarily as a matter of freeing certain native, spontaneous instincts from the influence of feelings and desires. Of particular concern to Dai is the view that merely by eliminating or paring away such feelings and desires one can somehow become a good moral agent. As Dai sees it, this view neglects not just the deliberative, non-spontaneous work that one must do in order to act well, but also the crucial role that affects should play in those deliberations. Thus his critique is aimed in particular at the idea that our native instincts, once freed of the influence of our feelings and desires, are somehow “complete and self-sufficient”—adequate by themselves to give proper moral guidance (Evidential Study, ch. 14, 27).

In Dai’s view, this Neo-Confucian account is factually wrong, and as such does profound injustice to the role that education and cultivation should have in the development of the moral understanding. If we see our work in moral self-cultivation as primarily subtractive or eliminative—as a matter of overcoming bad feelings and desires so as to let the refined parts of the nature act of their own accord—then, Dai maintains, it makes no sense to think of moral education as contributing to the growth and maturation of the moral understanding. What we learn in the process of study (xue) might be understood as having instrumental value, helping to free us from the grip of our bad dispositions and realize the dormant moral sensibilities in ourselves, but once that is accomplished the content of our knowledge would seem to play noconstitutive part in moral comprehension. It is this demotion of education to mere instrument that the erudite Dai Zhen finds to be deeply mistaken. When we learn from the classics, he argues, they have a transformative effect on the faculty of the understanding (xinzhi), helping it to see the morally salient features of one’s life more clearly and respond more appropriately (ch. 14). Just as the nourishment of food and water actually becomes a part of the thing it is meant to nourish, he maintains, so too do the contributions of one’s education become, in a psychological analogue to digestion, a part of the understanding (ch. 9, 26).

Dai is particularly troubled by the pernicious effects the Neo-Confucian account has on its adherents—and, after centuries of Neo-Confucian orthodoxy, on popular culture as well. When the account is strictly followed, he argues, it does not allow the feelings of others to have the right kind of purchase on our own moral evaluations and judgments. If the principal work of moral action lies in eliminating meddlesome emotions, Dai argues, then our deliberations could not be informed by personal acquaintance with the feelings of others (the kind we get from imagining ourselves asthe other person, which is presumably distinct from the kind we get by inferring merely from general rules or observational data). The sentiments stirred by such an acquaintance would be seen as interfering with the authentic expression of the good natural instincts within oneself. Left unchecked by a proper understanding of the felt responses of others, however, Dai maintains that a person’s moral conclusions are at best subjective “opinions” (yijian) and not what Dai calls “invariant norms” (buyi zhi ze)—so named because they represent views that could under ideal circumstances attain a kind of universal agreement across all times and places (ch. 4, 42). In several remarkable passages, Dai writes movingly about the abuses of power that such a doctrine would condone when adopted by those in a position to impose their decisions on the weak or institutionally disadvantaged, unconstrained by the feelings of the helpless people most affected by such decisions (ch. 5, 10).

Another pernicious feature of the Neo-Confucian account, and for Dai Zhen the most alarming one, is that it prevents proper consideration of benefits and harms from figuring in one’s moral deliberations. This problem inspires Dai’s most passionate remarks, as he notes repeatedly how the Neo-Confucian view would blind its adherents to the detrimental effects of their own actions. Unable to consult their desires, he argues, moral agents would have no practicable way of discerning what really matters to the well-being of others (nor, he hints, would they even be capable of recognizing what would or would not contribute to their own well-being). Combined with the first worry, about the inability of others’ claims to suitably inform one’s own personal deliberations, this leaves agents in what Dai describes as “a state of profound blindness,” unable to know what behaviors qualify as good and incapable of being alerted to their mistakes by others (ch. 4). When the doctrine of native self-sufficiency is deeply embraced, Dai concludes, “its harm is great, and yet no one is able to be aware of it” (ch. 43).

b. Sympathy as a Form of Moral Deliberation

Dai Zhen’s corrective for the shortcomings of the Neo-Confucian view (and its Daoist and Buddhist forebears) is an emotional attitude known as “shu,” whose meaning for Dai most closely approximates what we might call “sympathy” or “sympathetic concern.” The characteristic way of exercising shu, for Dai, is to imagine oneself in another’s shoes and so ask what one might desire if one were that person. By reconstructing another person’s desires one can better appreciate the extent to which certain states of affairs would benefit or harm that person. Dai assumes that some simulation of desires (and resultant feelings) is necessary to take proper account of potential benefits and harms, and he insists that the desire-averse picture of moral action upheld by the Neo-Confucians rules out such an exercise from the start. Thus he concludes that the Neo-Confucian picture is unable to fulfill what he takes to be a fundamental demand of any viable account of moral deliberation.

Not just any exercise of shu will provide reliable information about human well-being. For Dai, as for most other Confucian thinkers, shu can be done well or poorly. Given the rather cerebral form of moral cultivation Dai advocates, he believes that most moral agents need a great deal of education before they can make truly informed judgments. Even with this caveat in mind, however, Dai’s critics and occasionally his admirers have often constructed accounts of shuthat make it all too easy to dismiss.

One temptation for those whose intuitions are driven by the English word “sympathy” is to see Dai as advocating an exercise in mirroring or replicating the psychological states of others, especially their desires. If this were the case, shu would seem a poor indicator of the mirrored person’s well-being, since the person may well want things that are bad for her. But in fact Dai’s account of shu leaves it open to the moral agent to simulate counterfactual psychological states. Strictly speaking, Dai understands shu as the act of “taking oneself and extending it to others” (ch. 15), leaving it to the agent to judge which states would be the appropriate ones to synthesize.

A more common temptation is to say that Dai advocates bringing whatever desires we happen to have into our sympathetic reconstruction of the other’s point of view. If I am a solitary type of person, presumably, then I am to imagine others with the same preference for solitude. But this interpretation leaves Dai vulnerable to the charge of sympathetic paternalism, whereby one reconstructs another’s point of view on the basis of affective predispositions that are not the other’s. If this is how shu is supposed to work, then it would again seem a flawed measure of well-being, for others might benefit a great deal more from friendship and company than I, for instance.

The problem with this reading is that it assigns shu no critical role in selecting the desires that are to be synthesized. Just as the first interpretation depicts shu as naïvely mirroring or replicating the wants of another, the second depicts it as naïvely adopting one’s own wants, with no regard to whether these are true indicators of the other’s well-being. In fact, there is considerable evidence that Dai Zhen, at least in his more cogent moments, understands shu as being much more selective than either of these models would suggest. More than just imagining others with the same desires that one happens to have, Dai also sees shu as helping to identify the desires that really matter for welfare in the first place, which he understands as the desires that contribute to “life” (sheng) or “the fulfillment of life” (sui sheng). These are the basic desires which, upon sufficient reflection, we find that we all share—a common core that belong to what Dai sometimes characterizes as “the ordinary human feelings” (ren zhi changqing) and more often describes as the “true feelings” (qing) (ch. 5). In using shu, Dai suggests, one finds similarities that cut across distinctions in power or position: “If one genuinely returns to oneself and reflects on the true feelings of the weak, the few, the dull, the timid, the diseased, the elderly, the young, the orphaned, or the solitary, can those [true feelings] of these others really be any different from one’s own?” (ch. 2).

While there is evidence to suggest that Dai sees shu as having a robust role in selecting desires, it is less clear what the precise mechanism of selection is supposed to be. Possibly the very exercise of constructing a new point of view is supposed to help free one of the clutter of one’s own misguided or excessively idiosyncratic predilections. And Dai probably sees the special care or concern for a person inherent in shu as drawing attention to the desires that really matter to her, much in the way that grief or love draw attention to the features of a person to which the griever or lover is most attached. Dai also hints that there should be some sort of comparative exercise in shu, where one reconstructs the emotional reactions of others and measures them against those that one would have oneself under similar circumstances.

However Dai understands shu to work in detail, he is emphatic about its use as a form of moral deliberation. So understood, Dai suggests, it relies upon our desires in ways incompatible with the Neo-Confucian account of moral agency. His criticisms point to at least two such ways. First, proper moral action as Dai conceives of it requires that we use our desires in the process of deliberation. Second, it requires that we have a certain baseline of dispositions to want the right things. In other words, moral deliberation requires that we “have desires” both in an occurrent sense (as when I am described as actively feeling some inclination to eat good food) and in a dispositional sense (as when I am described as the kind of person who wants good food, even if I am presently working on an essay and not thinking about food at all). Thus, Dai’s picture of moral agency conflicts with the Neo-Confucian account not just in how it envisions moral deliberation but also in its conception of the kind of person that a good moral agent should be. Dai maintains that good human beings should have robust dispositions to desire beneficial things, which in turn requires that they have a healthy interest in their own well-being or life-fulfillment. Without the desire to “fulfill one’s own life,” Dai contends, one will “regard the despairing conditions of others with indifference” (ch. 10). Dai thus unabashedly asserts that even self-interested desires should figure prominently in the life of the virtuous moral agent.

3. Human Nature and Moral Cultivation

Like most Confucian philosophers, Dai Zhen shows a great deal of interest in the moral proclivities of human nature, a topic which by his time had long taken its bearings from Mencius’ (391-308 BCE) famous claim that the natural dispositions are good, and Xunzi (310-219 BCE) equally renowned polemic against this Mencian view. Although Dai is not alone in taking up this particular debate between Mencius and Xunzi, it nevertheless presents him with an important opportunity to sort through an apparent tension in his work, for it is Mencius that Dai takes to speak with final authority, and yet many of Dai’s own views carry an undisguised debt to Xunzian thinking about the relationship between nature, agency, and self-cultivation. Unlike most major figures who have weighed in on the Mencius-Xunzi debate, then, Dai has an interest in confirming much of Xunzi’s position while showing with great care and nuance how Xunzi’s views can be rendered compatible with the thesis that human dispositions are good by nature.

The parts of Xunzi’s doctrine that resonate most deeply with Dai Zhen concern the need to reshape the natural dispositions. If they are already more or less good, Xunzi reasons, it is hard to see why we would need an education that in any meaningful way transforms them. Our nature would already provide adequate or nearly adequate resources for moral self-improvement. Furthermore, Xunzi is plausibly read as upholding a picture of moral cultivation where the heart-and-mind must often overrule the desires, directing the body to act in ways contrary to the tug of one’s felt inclinations.

Like Xunzi, Dai is particularly concerned to develop a picture of the natural dispositions that would countenance a transformative account of self-cultivation. After all, one of the centerpieces of his philosophical work is a critique of the Neo-Confucian account of cultivation as merely subtractive or eliminative—as helping us to remove the bad parts of our nature, but forming no constitutive part of the cultivated self. Dai also shares with Xunzi the presupposition that this transformation requires some sort of power by the heart-and-mind to overrule the desires, and even uses language nearly identical to Xunzi’s to describe the mechanism of control—likening the heart-and-mind to the ruler (jun) of the body in that it issues orders of “permission or denial” (ke fou) to act on the desires of the latter (ch. 8). Thus Dai believes both that our dispositions begin in need of a great deal of reshaping and that one’s heart-and-mind must often resist the pull of the natural dispositions in order to reshape it.

One can consistently maintain this view while upholding the doctrine of natural goodness, Dai thinks, simply by acknowledging that there are parts of one’s nature that are not manifest in the raw, pre-cultivated state. Dai recognizes (as is now routinely observed) that much of Xunzi’s argument depends on a narrow understanding of “nature,” by which anything that appears before the deliberate activity of moral education is considered natural, and anything that appears afterwards is a product of human artifice. But Dai insists that one’s nature consists of latent capacities as well, potentialities which may not always be immediately manifest but which could nevertheless be said to be part of one’s nature, or in one’s nature, as the potential to grow into a peach tree is in the pit of a peach (ch. 25, 29).

In saying this, Dai takes himself to be making a much stronger and more capacious claim than one might think, for if human beings have in their nature the potential to become good, Dai believes, then this happy outcome could be brought about only by building upon nascent goodness, or virtues, already in existence. In other words, if we are to be capable of both understanding the good and being motivated by it, then we must already have some germ of moral understanding and some ability to delight in the good, even if these moral buds have no discernable effect on our behavior. This is because, as Dai puts it, moral inquiry and study are to one’s moral capacities as the nutritive powers of food and drink are to the material endowments of the body: one cannot use them to nurture or grow their intended objects unless some budding form of that object already exists (ch. 26).

This particular move in Dai’s argument might seem controversial. It assumes, after all, that the operations of moral inquiry and study really are like the nurturing of something that already exists, and not, for example, like the procreation or generation of something entirely new. But underlying this argument is a larger commitment to a picture of moral education as always building on some prior ability to appreciate the relevant norms, and it may have been this commitment that in the end makes the Xunzian account of the natural dispositions untenable in Dai’s eyes. For Dai, even at the earliest stages one learns by drawing upon one’s pre-existing grasp of propriety (li) and righteousness (yi), enlarging and expanding upon the understanding that one already has. In contrast, for Xunzi (as Dai reads him), those who aspire to goodness must start from scratch, without the benefit of nascent tendencies to appreciate the good (ch. 25-26).

4. Metaphysics and Metaethics

Most accounts of Dai Zhen’s place in the history of Chinese philosophy focus on his contributions to the ongoing dispute about the ontological status of li (pattern, principle) and qi (vital energy, material force), the two things most often proposed as the fundamental constituents of the universe in later Confucian metaphysics. Neo-Confucians such as Zhu Xi were arguably dualists about li and qi, acknowledging that the two could not exist apart from one another, but also seeing them as mutually irreducible. By contrast, Dai’s treatises seek to explain away the phenomena and the canonical terminology that strike so many of his predecessors as referencing irreducible notions of li, often by recasting them as references to the cyclical movements of yin and yang, or as particular arrangements of emotions or material bodies—all of these being typically understood as qi-based phenomena. Dai never declares himself a monist about qiin any unambiguous way,but he nevertheless devotes himself to showing how conceptions of the former should be explained in terms of the latter, and he is now frequently cited for the philological ingenuity and argumentative creativity that he brought to bear against Zhu Xi’s dualism.

As the great synthesizer of Neo-Confucian thought, Zhu Xi understands li as the cosmological patterns or principles that both make a thing the kind of thing it is (e.g., a human being rather than a goat) and determine the norms to which a thing should conform (e.g., serving one’s family, being of sound mind, and so on). Proper accounts of a thing’s kind and its norms should, Zhu believes, ultimately appeal to these patterns, not to the endowment of qi—the stuff that makes up one’s body and embodied feelings and desires—that a thing happens to have. Zhu understands li both as patterns that belong to the cosmos as a whole and, as Dai is fond of pointing out, as formless things that somehow exist inside all concrete individuals, including the heart-and-mind of every human being. These internalized li are, for Zhu, the “parts” or “manifestations” (fen) of the cosmological li, which implies in turn that the patterns belonging to each concrete individual are produced by (and thus harmonize with) the patterns that govern Heaven and Earth.

Dai Zhen’s trenchant criticism of the metaphysical picture offered by Zhu and other Neo-Confucians is that they wrongly took li and qi to be “two roots” (er ben)—that is, they mistakenly saw li as being “rooted” separately from qi (ch. 19). This critique encapsulates two general sorts of errors that he finds in the thought of his Neo-Confucian predecessors. The first is their tendency to see li as being separately “rooted” in the sense of having independent causal power. For example, Dai never embraces the view that the liare somehow responsible for making an individual thing the kind of thing it is. If li have anything to do with distinguishing between kinds, he maintains, it is simply because they represent the fine-grained features of things that we use to identify what kind they are, not the causal agent that makes them what they are (ch. 1). Similarly, he takes issue with the Neo-Confucian assertion that there is some li-based cosmological force that gives rise to qi’s tendency to fluctuate between two extremes (yin and yang). For Dai, the term for this purported cosmological force, known from the Classic of Change as “extreme polarity” or “taiji,” simply describes or names the fundamental oscillation in the cosmic qi. It is not a distinct force that makes the qi move as it does (ch. 18).

The second sense in which Dai’s predecessors see li as separately “rooted” is in conceiving of it as having independent explanatory power, such that one could give an adequate account of li without appealing to qi. The consequences of this sort of error are most apparent in moral claims. For Zhu Xi, to say that someone’s behavior is virtuous or good is to say that it is a proper expression of the li in her, which means in turn that it is a proper expression of some natural endowment of patterning imbued in her heart-and-mind by Heaven. Dai sees this as the wrong sort of story to tell, not just because it presupposes the existence of an unlikely causal agent (the formless “li” of the individual heart-and-mind), nor because he rejects the view that our Heavenly-endowed nature is predisposed in some small way to recognize and delight in the good (in fact, Dai seems to accept some version of this picture). Rather, Dai sees it as mistaken because it has nothing to do with why such behavior is good. Dai’s own preferred account invokes not the proclivities of Heaven as a basis for moral claims, but instead the proper arrangement of such worldly qi-based things as emotional dispositions and desires. Things are in accordance with their proper patterns, Dai asserts, when “the feelings do not err” (ch. 2).

Ever the attentive classicist, Dai traces much of the confusion he finds in the Neo-Confucian usage of “li” to a subtle misreading of the Confucian canon. In the Confucian classics, Dai notes, when the term “li” is used in its moral sense it tends to refer to the state of things when they are patterned in the right way, or “well-ordered” (tiao li) (ch. 1). Thus to speak of the “li” of something (e.g., a person, a boat) is not to refer to some formless object in that thing, but simply to the perfected state of that thing. The Neo-Confucians run afoul of this original sense of the word in assuming that “li” must denote something like an actual object, existing in esse. In so doing, Dai suggests, they open the door to a very different explanation of how someone becomes a “li” or “well-ordered” version of herself, where what makes her well-ordered is not simply that she has improved upon her feelings and desires in the right way, but that some quasi-object in her has expressed itself in the right way. For Dai, in contrast, it is enough to think of li as the state of things as they ought to be:

The exhaustive grasp of human li is nothing but an exhaustive grasp of what is imperative (biran) in human relations and daily affairs, and that is all. “What is imperative” is to push something to its greatest limit, where it can no longer be altered, and this is to speak of its perfection, not to trace out its root. (ch. 13)

5. Influence

At the time of Dai Zhen’s death he was widely revered for his scholarship in such fields as mathematics and phonology but ignored or dismissed as a philosopher. Among his contemporaries, the best-known admirers of his work on metaphysics and ethics were Hong Bang (1745-1779) and Zhang Xuecheng (1738-1801), though their admiration had little impact on other scholars of the era. Dai’s most successful student and friend, Duan Yucai (1735-1815), wrote a biography of Dai in which he dutifully reported his teacher’s profound devotion to and enthusiasm for his less popular philosophical works. But Duan never shared that enthusiasm and himself worked on conventional philological issues.

Only in the late nineteenth and early twentieth century were Dai’s On the Good and Evidential Study taken up with much interest, notably by reform-minded thinkers such as Zhang Taiyan (1868-1936), Liu Shipei (1884-1919), and Liang Qichao (1873-1929), who were particularly drawn to Dai’s suggestion that Cheng-Zhu thought countenanced abuses of power unchecked by the feelings and desires of the disadvantaged or powerless. Later, with the rise of Marxist thought in China, Dai’s attack on Neo-Confucian li—and his concomitant interest in explaining phenomena in terms of qi—made his work a convenient centerpiece for sweeping narratives about the decline of “idealism” and rise of “materialism” in the Ming and Qing dynasties. To some extent this preoccupation with Dai’s place in the li-qi debate lingers in the literature today, although scholars have increasingly turned to focus on his moral philosophy in its own right. Throughout the last two centuries, Dai has remained one of the chief sources of inspiration to those Confucian scholars who find Song and Ming Confucianism to be unviable or fundamentally contaminated with Daoist and Buddhist concepts. As such, he continues to be regarded as one of the most prominent internal critics of the Confucian tradition today.

6. References and Further Reading

Although the study of Dai Zhen’s life and work has become a minor cultural industry in the last couple of decades, there is still relatively little published material that focuses primarily on his philosophy, and even less that is accessible to those unfamiliar with the exegetical disputes prominent in his day. Readers are encouraged to begin with Feng Youlan and Philip J. Ivanhoe (below), and to make use of general surveys of the history of Chinese philosophy.

  • Chin, Ann-ping, and Freeman, Mansfield. Tai Chen [Dai Zhen] on Mencius: Explorations in Words and Meanings. New Haven: Yale University Press, 1990.
    • A widely available summary of Dai’s life and thought, with a complete if not always careful translation of Dai’s most important philosophical work, the Evidential Study.
  • Ewell, John W. Reinventing the Way: Dai Zhen’s Evidential Commentary on the Meanings of Terms in Mencius (1777). Berkeley: Ph.D. dissertation in history, 1990.
    • Includes the strongest of the available English translations of Dai’s Evidential Study.
  • Feng Youlan [Fung Yu-lan]. A History of Chinese Philosophy,volume II. Trans. Derk Bodde. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1953.
    • An English translation of this well-known scholar’s monumental survey of history of Chinese philosophy. The portion devoted to Dai Zhen is replete with ample quotations from Dai’s works.
  • Hu Shi. Dai Dongyuan de zhexue (The Philosophy of Dai Dongyuan). Reprinted in Taipei: Taiwan Shangwu, 1996.
    • An important and thorough if somewhat dated introduction to Dai Zhen’s philosophy and his place in Qing dynasty academics. This edition also includes the full texts of Dai’s On the Goodand Evidential Study,as well as several of his letters.
  • Ivanhoe, Philip J. “Dai Zhen.” In Confucian Moral Self Cultivation, 2nd ed. (Indianapolis, IN: Hackett Publishing Company, 2000): 89-99.
    • The best introduction to Dai Zhen’s moral thought in the English language. This work also exhibits the rare virtue (in Dai Zhen studies) of being accessible to those less familiar with classical Chinese language and Neo-Confucianism.
  • Lao Siguang. Xin bian zhong guo zhe xue shi (History of Chinese Philosophy, new edition). Taipei : San min shu ju, 1981.
    • A view of Dai Zhen from one of his more strident critics, presented as the final chapter of a survey of Chinese philosophy. Lao uses little charity in attempting to understand Dai, but his is one of the very few lengthy studies that focuses primarily on the philosophical content of Dai’s views.
  • Nivison, David S. “Two Kinds of ‘Naturalism’: Dai Zhen and Zhang Xuecheng.” In The Ways of Confucianism: Investigations in Chinese Philosophy, ed. Bryan Van Norden (Chicago: Open Court, 1996): 261-82.
    • Nivison’s contribution to the academic “cottage industry” in studies of Dai’s influence on Zhang. Like most such studies, this piece is primarily an exercise in intellectual history, but Nivison’s passing summaries of Dai’s views are careful and insightful.
  • Shun, Kwong-loi. “Mencius, Xunzi, and Dai Zhen: A Study of the Mengzi ziyi shuzheng.” In Mencius: Contexts and Interpretations, ed. Alan K. L. Chan (Honolulu: University of Hawaii Press, 2002): 216-241.
    • An overview of Dai Zhen’s masterwork. This piece is particularly helpful in sorting out Dai’s several ways of understanding the doctrine that human nature is good.
  • Tiwald, Justin. “Dai Zhen on Human Nature and Moral Cultivation.” In the Dao Companion to Neo-Confucian Philosophy, ed. John Makeham (Dordrecht [Netherlands]: Springer, 2009): Ch. 20.
    • An extended overview and analysis of Dai’s ethics.
  • Yu Yingshi. Lun Dai Zhen yu Zhang Xuecheng (On Dai Zhen and Zhang Xuecheng). Taipei: Dong da tu shu gu fen you xian gong si, 1996.
    • Originally published in 1976, this is one of the best Chinese language works on Dai Zhen’s philosophical life and writings, although the focus is on Dai’s influence on Zhang Xuecheng and Qing dynasty academics.

Author Information

Justin Tiwald
San Francisco State University
U. S. A.

Louise-Françoise de la Baume Le Blanc, marquise de La Vallière (1644—1710)

lavalliereA mistress of Louis XIV, who became a Carmelite nun, Mademoiselle de la Vallière has long fascinated historians and novelists by her picaresque life.  But only recently has the philosophical dimension of that life received attention.  During her years as royal mistress, La Vallière studied the works of Aristotle and Descartes in the literary salons of Paris.  After her religious conversion under the direction of Bossuet, she composed a treatise dealing with the mercy of God.  In this work and in her correspondence, La Vallière revealed her skill as a moraliste, a critic of the contradictions and subterfuges of the human psyche.  Her writings focus in particular on virtue theory.  La Vallière privileges the theological virtues of faith, hope, and charity; she criticizes the unredeemed cardinal virtues as masks of human pride.  As a social critic, La Vallière demonstrates how the culture of the court has produced counterfeits of the theological virtues. Her writings insist on the necessary presence of grace for the emergence of authentic virtue, as well as express skepticism on the capacity of nature alone to cultivate virtue.  Rather than being abolished, the human passions undergo their own conversion in the grace-induced dynamic of repentance and reform.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Works
  3. Moral Philosophy
    1. Virtue Theory
    2. Nature and Grace
    3. Theory of Passions
  4. Reception and Interpretation
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Biography

On August 6, 1644, Louise-Françoise de la Baume Le Blanc de laVallière was born into an aristocratic family in Tours.  Both parents claimed a distinguished lineage.  Her father, Laurent, Seigneur de la Vallière, descended from a family noted for its military service to the French crown.  At the time of his daughter’s birth, he held the post of governor of the royal chateau of Amboise.  Descended from a noblesse de robe family known for its legal service to the throne, her mother, Françoise Le Prévost, was the widow of a prominent member of the parliament in Paris.  After the death of Louise-Françoise’s father in 1651, Jacques de Courtavel, marquis de Saint Rémy, married her newly widowed mother.  In the recurrent struggles between the absolutist French monarchy and the restive aristocracy attempting to maintain its ancient privileges, the members of the La Vallière family sided with the royalist cause.

Mademoiselle de la Vallière was raised in a militantly Catholic provincial aristocracy.  Ecclesiastical vocations were common in her immediate family.  Uncle Gilles was bishop of Nantes; Uncle Jacques was a Jesuit priest; Aunts Élisabeth and Charlotte were Ursuline nuns.  La Vallière’s formal education was primarily literary.  Under the tutelage of her Urusuline aunts, the young Louis-Françoise studied grammar, reading, composition, and public speaking.  In 1655, she moved to the chateau of Blois for her adolescent education.  The official residence of Gaston, duc d’Orléans, the brother of Louis XIII, Blois permitted La Vallière to join the Orléans daughters in the courses conducted by the house chaplain, Abbé de Rancé, a cultured theologian who would later emerge as one of France’s leading monastic reformers.  In this royal curriculum, La Vallière studied the arts of painting, music, etiquette, and equitation as well as continuing her literary studies.  Under the guidance of Rancé, she was introduced to the neo-Aristotelian elements of the catechesis mandated by the Council of Trent.

Closely tied to the royal family, La Vallière made her official debut at court in 1661 when she was appointed a lady-in-waiting to Henriette d’Angleterre, the wife of Louis, duc d’Orléans.  At the moment of her arrival, court gossips were criticizing the excessive amount of private time Louis XIV was spending with his beautiful sister-in-law.  Royal counselors encouraged the king to deflect the rumors of an incestuous affair by appearing to express romantic interest in the new member of Henriette’s entourage, La Vallière.  The royal secretary Dangeau ghostwrote a series of romantic letters allegedly written by Louis XIV and La Vallière; other courtiers arranged late-night meetings between the king and the lady-in-waiting that projected the air of a romantic tryst.  The ruse quickly became fact as Louis XIV become infatuated with the cultured new courtier.  La Vallière was recognized as the official royal mistress and bore the king four children: Charles (1663-65), Philippe (1665-66), Marie Anne de Bourbon (1666-1739), and Louis de Bourbon (1667-83).  The king later legitimized his two surviving children and ennobled them under the respective titles Mademoiselle de Blois and Comte de Vermandois.

During her years as royal mistress, La Vallière continued to pursue her artistic and literary interests.  She attended performances of Racine and Molière, read the period’s fashionable novels, and took courses in painting at the Académie Royale.  La Vallière showed a predilection for philosophical issues.  In salon circles, she was known for her well-informed discussions on Aristotle’s Nicomachean Ethics and Descartes’s Discourse on Method.  Her circle of close intellectual friends was dominated by thinkers of a libertine tendency, notably Benserade and Lauzun.

In 1667, Louis XIV elevated La Vallière’s social status further by granting her the title of Duchesse de Vaujours, accompanied by the substantial estate at Vaujours.  But 1667 also marked the end of La Vallière’s ascendancy with the emergence of a rival, Madame de Montespan, who would ultimately displace La Vallière in the affection of the monarch and become the principal royal mistress.

Long troubled by scruples over her adulterous affair, La Vallière underwent a religious crisis in 1670.  After recovering from a serious illness, possibly smallpox, she made a confession of her sins and returned to the regular practice of the Catholic faith.  Under the direction of the court preacher Bossuet, La Vallière abandoned the social activities of the court and began to lead a penitential life of prayer and mortification.  Renouncing her former libertine allies, La Vallière allied herself to the parti dévot, a group of pious lay courtiers who opposed the moral decadence of the court.  In her new spiritual reading, La Vallière discovered the works of the Catholic Counter-Reformation, in particular Saint Teresa of Avila’s Path of Perfection, with its ascetical and mystical conception of virtue and beatitude.  Under the influence of Bossuet in 1671, La Vallière wrote a theological work, Reflections on the Mercy of God, which paralleled the divine attribute of mercy with the virtues proper to the repentant sinner.

The sudden conversion of a Versailles courtesan turned La Vallière into a religious celebrity but humiliated Louis XIV, whose sexual infidelities and religious hypocrisy had become public knowledge.  Only in 1674 did the monarch permit his former mistress to pursue her vocation as a nun.  On April 19, 1674, La Vallière entered the Carmelite convent in Paris, where she would henceforth be known as Soeur Louise de la Miséricorde.  Preaching to a convent packed by the capital’s religious elite, Bishop Jean-Louis de Fromentière of Aires denounced the immorality of the court at Versailles; according to the bishop, La Vallière’s entry into the austerity of Carmel amounted to a moral miracle.  On June 4, 1675, Soeur Louise pronounced her vows as a Carmelite nun.  Queen Marie-Thérèse, the wife of Louis XIV, personally headed the congregation and witnessed the apotheosis of the former courtesan who had defied Versailles.  Preaching at the ceremony of profession, Bossuet pointedly drew the lesson that even the world’s most powerful persons must repent of their sins and cease their abuses of power.

During her secluded decades in the convent, Soeur Louise de la Miséricorde lived an exemplary life as a Carmelite nun, noted for the rigor of her penitential practices.  She did, however, continue the correspondence she had begun during her conversion with the lay leader of the parti dévot, Maréchal de Bellefonds.  Her letters show the clear spiritual influence of the école française by their recurrent stress on abandonment to divine providence and on annihilation of the self.  They also contain an ongoing critique of the immorality, violent ambition, and practical atheism she had witnessed in her court years.  In the convent parlor, Soeur Louise occasionally received acquaintances from her previous life: Rancé, Bossuet, Queen Marie-Thérèse, even her old rival, Madame de Montespan, who had also fallen from her former status as royal mistress.

Mademoiselle de la Vallière died on June 6, 1710.

2. Works

La Vallière left two principal works to posterity: the treatise Reflections on the Mercy of God and her spiritual correspondence with the Maréchal de Bellefonds.  The erratic history of the commentary and publication of these two works indicate how easily the philosophical reflection of women authors has been erased from the canon.

In 1671 in the immediate aftermath of her religious conversion, La Vallière composed Reflections on the Mercy of God.  A semi-autobiographical work, this treatise studies the mercy of God for sinners, especially for courtesans who have renounced their sexual sins and sought a new penitential life in exile from the excesses of the court.  The author appeals to feminine figures of repentance and sanctity in the New Testament, notably Saint Mary Magdalene, as paradigms of the conversion which La Vallière has undergone.  The work studies how faith, hope, charity, and other theological virtues function in the life of those led to authentic moral reformation through the action of grace.  Conversely, it dissects the false variants of faith, hope, and charity produced by the court culture of ambition and avarice.  The influence of the theology of Bossuet, her spiritual director during the crisis of conversion, is apparent in the text, although the simple, limpid prose style differs markedly from the more rhetorical and periodic style of Bossuet himself.

The first print edition of Reflections on the Mercy of God appeared anonymously in 1680.  A popular work of piety, the book had undergone ten editions by the beginning of the eighteenth century.  La Vallière was always considered the author of the book, which was clearly written in her style and full of allusions to her life as a courtesan.  Many editions published in her lifetime, such as the Frankfurt and Brussels editions in 1683, explicitly named her as the author, with no demurral from Soeur Louise or her associates.  In the nineteenth-century, literary critics noted that the later editions of Reflections used a longer and somewhat more elegant version of the text than had the earlier editions.  In 1852, Damas-Hinard claimed that the true author of the book was Bossuet, for whom La Vallière had only served as an amanuensis, but other critics dismissed the claim on the grounds of stylistic differences with Bossuet’s others’ works and of the clearly gendered autobiographical experiences the author had incorporated into the work. Although Bossuet had incontestably influenced the theological opinions of La Vallière and a later editor had imposed some stylistic alterations, the text remained substantially La Vallière’s own.

In 1928, the literary critic Marcel Langlois made a more startling claim: that La Vallière had not written the book at all.  Langlois based this claim on the argument that the rationalist tone of the work indicated that it was written by a man rather than by a woman.  Furthermore, no woman of the period could have possessed the philosophical and theological culture which the author clearly displays.  “We observe that the author reads Holy Scripture in Latin and that he makes references to Aristotle and Descartes.  A careful look at the text indicates that there is no trace of a feminine style.  We know that Mademoiselle de la Vallière was very depressed at this time and that she was a shy person all her life.  On the contrary, on every page, we hear the voice of a man, of a director of conscience.”  Led by Jean-Baptiste Eriau, other literary critics immediately refuted Langlois’s claim and reattributed the authorship of the work to La Vallière.  They pointed out that La Vallière was renowned precisely for her command of Aristotle and Descartes in salon debates and that many cultured laywomen of the period possessed bilingual Latin-French psalters and New Testaments.  The recent textual analyses by Petitfils (1990) and Huertas (1998) have reconfirmed the duchess’s authorship of Reflections on the Mercy of God.

La Vallière’s other extant work, her correspondence with the Maréchal de Bellefonds, underwent a similarly tangled publication history.  The first edition of her letters (1767) was so full of errors, omissions, and interpellations as to be corrupt.  Her alleged memoirs (1829) were a fabrication.  Only Pierre Clément’s two-volume edition of her works in 1860 provided the first reliable publication of her letters to Bellefonds.  Her correspondence explores the ascetical and mystical sentiments of the soul and continues the critique of the moral corruption to which the courtier is prone.

3. Moral Philosophy

The primary philosophical interest in the works of La Vallière resides in her treatment of virtue in Reflections on the Mercy of God.  She rejects the claims of pagan antiquity to have possessed authentic moral virtues, exalts the theological virtues, and criticizes the moral values of the court as a distortion of the theological virtues, altered to suit ambitious self-interest.  Grace, rather than human merit, emerges as the cause of authentic virtue. Instead of minimizing the passions as a hindrance to the cultivation of virtue, La Vallière esteems the human emotions, especially the passion of love, as central to the moral personality of the human agent redeemed by grace.

3a. Virtue Theory

In Reflections on the Mercy of God, La Vallière develops her theory of the theological virtues of faith, hope, and charity.  The treatise also diagnoses the opponents and the distortions of the theological virtues in the aristocratic society of the period.

Faith emerges as more than an assent to the truths revealed by God and proposed by the teaching authority of the Catholic Church; it entails a militant opposition to the world.  This firmness of faith brooks no compromise with worldly allurements.  “O my God, give me…a firm faith that makes me believe in Your words and makes me remember, when the world wants me to follow it, that we cannot serve two masters” (RMD no.4).  When authentic, this militant faith comports two other virtues: humility and enlightenment.  The humility of faith closely ties the believer to the imitation of Jesus crucified, the opposite of conformity to the world’s concept of glory.  A properly enlightened faith continually reminds the believer of the radical superiority of eternal God over the fleeting world in terms of glory.

In her analysis of faith, La Vallière diagnoses the enemies of faith in the cultured society of her age.  Three positions in particular earn her rebuke: conventionalism, libertinism, and rationalism.  Religious conventionalism has reduced to faith a matter of external ritual, shorn of interior moral conversion.  “These are persons who, in the midst of shadows that blind them, refuse to be enlightened by the light of these theological truths.  We could say that a soul sunk within the world, without prayer, without reflection, and without consulting God on questions of conduct, is similar to a ship with neither captain nor rudder in the midst of a storm” (RMD no. 22).  For the conventional, faith is a simple matter of social conformity.

Libertinism proposes a more explicit rejection of the virtue of faith.  Its posture is marked by contempt for the very enterprise of religion.  “I will flee with horror all those evil people who parade their libertinism, who brag about their vices, and who, as Scripture says, never consider God in their conduct….These militant libertines can only help to foster irreligion, to destroy the purest reputation, to give us an exaggerated sense of self-worth that merits Your abandonment of us, to honor evil and those who commit it” (RMD no. 15).  The libertinism censured in this passage is clearly that of the courtier.  The destruction of reputation by malicious gossip and the vanity of proximity to power are the vices of the libertine courtier who holds traditional religion and its allied virtue of humility in contempt.

More subtle than libertinism, rationalism erodes faith by subjecting what lies beyond human reason to the judgment of fallible human reason.  La Vallière defends the orthodox faith of those who resist the rationalist attacks on the supernatural.  “I speak of those who are astonished to learn that there are some people who believe the histories of Alexander and Caesar but who doubt the history of Jesus Christ…who believe the truth of the gospel preached by a dozen poor preachers and of the establishment of His Church founded on an infinite number of miracles…who believe that so many mysteries incomprehensible to the human mind are pure effects of the omnipotence of Jesus Christ and of His infinite love toward His creatures” (RMD no.22).  This critique of rationalism defends the supernatural nature of the object of Christian faith by refusing to remove the miraculous and the mysterious from the content of faith.  Tellingly, it attacks historical-critical analysis of the Scriptures, which would undercut the historical veracity of the life of Christ.  In this particular line of attack, La Vallière is clearly influenced by her spiritual director Bossuet, who in the 1670s combated the historical-critical exegesis of Richard Simon, an Oratorian scholar who challenged the traditional thesis of the Mosaic authorship of the entire Pentateuch, the five opening books of the Bible.

In her treatment of hope, La Vallière similarly distinguishes between the authentic virtue and its counterfeits in the milieu of the court.  True hope emerges as trust in the redemptive power of God. “I implore you, Lord, by the merit of this precious blood that flows from Your sacred wounds that You offer to the eternal Father as the price of my redemption, a true confidence in Your mercies” (RMD no.7).  Hope can easily deteriorate into presumption when the sinner forgets divine justice and uses divine mercy as an excuse to delay repentance and moral reform.  “If You are a God full of compassion for sinners who return to You with all their hearts with hope in Your mercy, You are a terrifying God toward those who trust in You only to multiply their own offenses and who, having tasted the sweetness of your graces, only mock and hold them in contempt” (RMD no. 7).

In court society, theological hope has been eclipsed by the predominance of a purely secular hope for political and economic advancement.  The egocentric hopes of ambition have crowded out the authentic hope of eternal life in Christ.  “May this solid hope, showing me the nothingness and fragility of everything we call here below position, fortune, wealth, and grandeur, make me no longer esteem them as most people esteem them.  They act as if no other happiness and no other life exist after this one” (RMD no.16).  The danger of such a careerist hope is that it ignores rather than explicitly opposes the theological hope of immortality.  In such a purely terrestrial version of hope, the promise of eternity simply vanishes from concern.

Like other Christian writers, La Vallière accords primacy to the virtue of charity among the theological virtues.  Authentic charity is tempered by courage, the willingness to accept the world’s mockery out of fidelity to God.  “Create a new heart in me: a humble, firm, constant, and courageous heart, free from the world and its creatures─a truly Christian heart, whereby I will love You when I must sacrifice my life and fortune in witness to Your name and pay homage to the folly of the cross at the heart of a country and of a nation that consider it a scandal” (RMD no.11).  La Vallière’s concept of charity is not one of simple affection toward God and neighbor; it is contextualized as the love of God manifested in a society whose pride and self-esteem hold the cross, the central symbol of God’s love, in contempt.

The opposition to authentic charity is not generic hatred or indifference; it is specifically the contempt of others manifest by an ambitious aristocracy.  The malicious gossip of the courtier and of the salonnière is a prominent symptom of the contempt by which the neighbor is humiliated in court society.  “We only prize these gross sarcastic remarks and personal attacks, unworthy even for a pagan.  We consider as of no consequence words which attack the very soul of our neighbors, which mockingly dissect their faults and which make them appear ridiculous….We dismiss as nothing the destruction of their happiness and reputation as long as we do it with an entertaining laugh” (RMD no.17).  In this passage, the aristocratic society of wit is unmasked as the determined enemy of authentic charity, which finds its apotheosis in the humble sacrifice of the cross.

3b. Nature and Grace

For La Vallière, nature itself cannot cause moral virtue to exist, since nature exists in a state of postlapsarian corruption.  All moral virtue, and not only the theological virtues, requires God’s grace to emerge and mature.

Reflections on the Mercy of God argues that traditional moral virtues, even the cardinal virtues, are only masks for various vices.  The alleged virtue of prudence, for example, dissembles the human desire for security.  “God did not take flesh and die for us in order to grant our salvation through a comfortable life, according to the prudence of the sense and of the flesh….These moral virtues have no merit whatsoever before You if they are not animated by the merits and virtues of Jesus Christ” (RMD no.6).  Freed from the ingrained self-centeredness of human nature, authentic moral virtues constitute variations of the theological virtues, which are in turn the unmerited gift of God’s grace rather than products of human initiative.

This disjunction between apparent natural virtue and authentic supernatural virtue extends to the realm of intellectual virtue.  La Vallière sharply opposes the natural wisdom of the world, prized by philosophers, to the wisdom of the cross, revealed only by divine grace.  “Give me…less human and natural lights, out of fear that by following them rather than the lights of Your grace, I would lose myself.  By following them, instead of being a humble Christian, my self-love would turn me into a socialite philosopher, filled more with false maxims than with the science of the cross….This is the wisdom God hides from the haughty and reveals to the humble.  This is the wisdom which overturns prudence and which follows the movements of grace from Jesus Christ” (RMD no.5).  Rather than building on the wisdom of the world, the grace-inspired wisdom of the cross reveals the falsehood of the world’s account of what is true and valuable.  In the exercises of the intellect as in those of the will, only grace can permit the human agent to embrace actual, rather than counterfeit, goods.

3c. Theory of Passions

Whereas other moral philosophers of the period discounted or dismissed the passions in their account of the moral life, La Vallière places a positive value upon them in her ethical theory. Rather than being suppressed, the human passions should be presented to God for transformation in the itinerary of religious and moral conversion.  “Is it right that having found everything possible to satisfy my passions, which only had idols for their object, I find it difficult or impossible when I have to resurrect the passions and love You with all my heart?” (RMD no.12)  Just as the intellect and will must be transformed by grace through the acquisition of authentic wisdom and moral virtue, the emotions must be transformed by God into new sentiments of reverence and devotion.  It is love above all that must be altered from the self-centered quest for human esteem into the self-sacrificial adoration of God’s very self.

Prayerful meditation constitutes the privileged locus for the human agent to undergo this grace-inspired emotional transformation.  Rather than abolishing the human quest for pleasure, contemplation substitutes spiritual pleasure for the physical pleasures once sought by the sinful.  “There [in meditation] You make us find a holy and sovereign pleasure to love You above all things and to come often to speak to You, not only as our father and our God, but as the most tender friend we could ever have.  We come to lament before You about all of these passions that tyrannize us, about all these worries that upset us, and about all this sadness that exhausts us.  In the sweet exchange of prayer, we may show You the bottom of our hearts” (RMD no.19).  In this dialogical form of meditation, the meditant may present his or her emotional distresses before God for healing, just as he or she presents sins for forgiveness.  The mature fruit of such meditation is an unconditional love for God that slowly integrates once disordered passions into authentic charity for one’s neighbor.

4. Reception and Interpretation

The reception of the writings of Mademoiselle de La Vallière roughly follows three distinct phases: the devotional, the literary, and the philosophical.  In the late seventeenth, eighteenth, and early nineteenth centuries, La Vallière’s Reflections on the Mercy of God constituted a staple of French Catholic devotional literature.  Many commentators celebrated her as the French Magdalene and compared her to earlier examples of courtesans who had become public penitents, such as Saint Mary of Alexandria.  Madame de Genlis’s popular biography of La Vallière (1818) reflects this devotional image of the royal mistress who miraculously became a cloistered nun.

In the late nineteenth and early twentieth centuries, commentators focused more on the literary dimensions of La Vallière.  Illustrated by the works of Cornut (1857), Langlois (1932), and Eriau (1961), the protracted quarrel over the authorship of Reflections on the Mercy of God reflects this literary approach.  Petitfils (1990) has continued this scholarly concern for textual questions concerning La Vallière.

Recently, in such commentaries as those of Huertas (1998) and of Conley (2002), a greater emphasis has been given to the intellectual formation and philosophical theories of La Vallière.  Recent interest in virtue theory of moral philosophy and the development of a more sectarian ethics in recent Christian moral theology has highlighted the interest of La Vallière’s thesis that authentic moral and intellectual virtue is grounded in grace rather than in nature.  The recent feminist expansion of the canon of humanities has also underscored the claims of La Vallière to philosophical status, given her study of canonical philosophers such as Aristotle and Descartes, and also given her contributions to moral psychology through her treatise and correspondence.

5. References and Further Reading

All French to English translations above are by the author of this article.

a. Primary Sources

  • La Vallière, Françoise-Louise de la Baume Le Blanc, duchesse de. Réfléxions sur la Miséricorde de Dieu, suivies de ses lettres et des sermons pour sa vêture et sa profession, par messieurs d’Aires et de Condom, 2 vols., ed. Pierre Clément. Paris: J. Techner, 1860.
    • Despite its dated scholarship, Clément’s edition constitutes the most extensive print collection of writings by and concerning La Vallière.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Conley, John. The Suspicion of Virtue: Women Philosophers in Neoclassical France. Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 2002), 97-123.
    • The chapter studies the moral and social philosophy of La Vallière.
  • Conley, John. “Suppressing Women Philosophers: The Case of the Early Modern Canon,” Early Modern Women: An Interdisciplinary Journal 2006 1: 99-114.
    • The article examines the denial of attribution of authorship to La Vallière and other women philosophers of the period.
  • Cornut, Romain. Les Réflexions de Madame de la Vallière répentante écrite par elle-même et corrigées par Bossuet, 2nd ed. Paris: Didier, 1857.
    • Although Cornut exaggerates the role of Bossuet in the writing of Reflections, the degree and nature of Bossuet’s influence on La Vallière remains a topic of scholarly dispute.
  • Eriau, Jean-Baptiste. La Madeleine française: Louise de la Vallière dans sa famille, à la cour, au Carmel. Paris: Nouvelles éditions latines, 1961.
    • Eriau refutes Langlois’s misattribution of authorship of Reflections and restores the rightful attribution to La Vallière.
  • Genlis, Stéphanie, comtesse de. La Duchesse de la Vallière. Paris: Maradan, 1818.
    • This romanticized biography of La Vallière reflects the image of the repentant courtesan which had captivated the French Catholic public.
  • Huertas, Monique de. Louise de la Vallière: De Versailles au Carmel. Paris:Pygmalion/Watelet, 1998.
    • This biography of La Vallière discusses her participation in the philosophical salons of the period.
  • Langlois, Marcel. La conversion de Mlle de la Vallière et l’auteur véritable des Réflexions.  Paris: Plon, 1932.
    • Langlois’s denial of La Vallière’s authorship of Reflections was immediately refuted by other literary critics.
  • Petitfils, Jean-Christian. Louise de la Vallière. Paris: Perrin, 1990.
    • Petifils’s scholarly biography contains a critical edition of an early version of La Vallière’s Reflections on the Mercy of God.

Author Information

John J. Conley
Loyola University in Maryland
U. S. A.

Anne-Thérèse Marguenat de Courcelles, marquise de Lambert (1647—1733)

LambertA prominent salonnière in the France of Louis XIV and the Regency, Madame de Lambert authored numerous essays dealing with philosophical issues.  Her most famous works, twin sets of instructions to her son and daughter, analyze the virtues to be cultivated by each gender in the aristocracy.  Men pursue glory while women focus on humility.  During the literary querelle de la femme, Lambert defends the dignity of women against misogynist stereotypes advanced by opponents of gender equality.  In her political writings, she criticizes the vices typical of the hierarchical society of the period, especially the unequal distribution of material goods.  The era’s distortion of friendship and mistreatment of the elderly also receive critical scrutiny.  Her religious philosophy leans toward the God of deism: a Supreme Being who should be honored for the works of creation but whose attributes do not transcend the categories of human reason.  Several works in aesthetics treat the subjective problem of taste and sensibility.  Throughout her writings, Lambert manifests her allegiance to a Cartesian understanding of the nature of philosophical analysis.  The French Enlightenment recognized the philosophical value of her works, most of which were published posthumously.  Fontenelle, Montesquieu, and Voltaire are the most prominent of the Enlightenment thinkers who lauded the philosophical acumen of Lambert.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Works
  3. Philosophical Themes
    1. Virtue Theory
    2. Gender and Dignity
    3. Ethics of Love
    4. Social Criticism
    5. Religious Philosophy
    6. Aesthetics
    7. Cartesianism
  4. Reception and Interpretation
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Biography

On September 25, 1647, Anne-Thérèse Marguenat de Courcelles was born in Paris to a provincial aristocratic family from the region of Troyes.  Both the paternal and maternal sides of the family had acquired substantial wealth from commercial transactions.  An administrator in the Chambre des Comptes, her father Étienne died on May 22, 1650.  Her mother Monique Passart then secretly married François Le Coigneux, seigneur de la Roche Turpin et de Bachaumont.  Anne-Thérèse received formal instruction at the convent of the Annonciades in Meulan, but it was her stepfather who cultivated the young Ann-Thérèse’s philosophical opinions.  A respected poet and memorialist, Bachamount introduced his stepdaughter to the neo-Epicurean philosophy he espoused in his writings.  He guided her study of the classics and helped to shape her limpid writing style in French.

On February 22, 1666, Anne-Thérèse married Henri de Lambert, marquis de Saint-Bris en Auxerrois, baron de Chitry et Augy.  Henceforth, she will be addressed as Marquise de Lambert or simply Madame de Lambert.  Descended from a provincial aristocratic family in Perigord, Henri de Lambert was a military officer who at the time of the marriage served as the captain of the First Company of the Royal Regiment of the Cavalry.  The marriage produced four children, one of whom died shortly after birth.

On June 12, 1684, Henri de Lambert reached the pinnacle of his political career when he was named governor of the duchy of Luxembourg.    He died suddenly on August 1, 1686.  His death was quickly followed by the death of their eleven-year old daughter, Monique.  The bereaved Madame de Lambert faced imminent impoverishment since she was locked in a lawsuit with her mother over the estate of her deceased father.  Estimated at over five-hundred thousand pounds in worth, the estate had been left entirely to Madame de Lambert’s mother by virtue of a will signed by her father.  The bitter adjudication of the will and the conflicting claims of mother and daughter did not end even with the mother’s death in 1692.  A royal pension permitted Madame de Lambert to survive and her two remaining children to pursue their education until the juridical controversy was settled largely in Lambert’s favor in the late 1690s.

In 1698 an economically secure Madame de Lambert opened her new residence in the Hôtel de Nevers in Paris.  Starting in 1710, she conducted a salon in the drawing room of her residence; it soon became the most intellectually distinguished salon in the capital.  She became noted for her contrasting “Tuesday” and “Wednesday” salons.  Tuesdays were devoted to men and women of letters.  Participants were expected to read aloud their works in progress and to debate the literary issues of the moment.  Wednesdays were devoted to more social receptions for the aristocracy living in the capital.

Prominent salon members included the philosophers Fontenelle and Montesquieu, the dramatist Marivaux, the classicist Anne Dacier, the poet Catherine Bernard, the theologian Fénelon, the tale-writer Marie-Catherine d’Aulnoy, and the mathematician Dortous de Mairan.  The intellectual distinction of Lambert’s salon earned it the sobriquet of bureau d’esprit (the business office of wit.)  The salon also earned a reputation as a place of literary intrigue, especially for lobbying for positions in the prestigious Académie française.  Lambert herself was credited with successfully lobbying for the appointment of Montesquieu from her “antechamber to the Académie.”  Although Lambert banned political and religious discussions from the salon sessions, her salon enjoyed a mildly libertine reputation.  She defended Montesquieu’s controversial Persian Letters, censured for its alleged religious skepticism, and supported Antoine Houdar de la Motte’s attacks on the neoclassical veneration of Homer and of the three unities in drama.

In the salon Madame Lambert shared her own writings with her guests.  Her early works were moral exhortations to her son and daughter respectively as they entered adulthood.  Later writings dealt with friendship, old age, and aesthetics.  Her writings were usually written in the form of a brief essay, modeled after her beloved Montaigne, and often incorporated the miniature literary genres then popular in the salons: maxim, literary portrait, literary dialogue, edifying tale.  Madame Lambert’s writings were written uniquely for diffusion in manuscript copies to members of her salon.  When a pirated edition of her Counsels of a Mother to her Son appeared in print in 1726, she vehemently protested and bought out what remained of the edition.  Publication of a book for public sale in the bookstalls of France was considered inappropriate for an aristocratic woman of the period; furthermore, the intimate details of family life revealed in these essays addressed to her children were not meant to be shared with the general public.  Despite Lambert’s protests, pirated print editions of her essays continued to sell briskly and quickly led to unauthorized translations into English.

Although her salon continued to flourish, the last years of Lambert’s life were darkened by the death of her daughter Monique-Thérèse in 1731 and by recurrent bouts of illness.  Madame de Lambert died on July 12, 1733.

2. Works

The works of Madame de Lambert attracted a broad European public from the time of the first pirated editions published during her lifetime: Counsels of a Mother to her Son (1726), New Reflections on Women (1727), and Counsels of a Mother to Her Editor (1728).  Her collected works enjoyed numerous editions throughout the eighteenth century (1747, 1748, 1750, 1751, 1758, 1761, 1766, 1774, 1785).  The English translation of her collected works enjoyed similar popularity in multiple editions (1749, 1756, 1769, 1770, 1781).  A German translation of the works appeared in 1750, a Spanish edition in 1781.

Most of Lambert’s extant works are written in the form of a brief essay, with occasional exercises in literary dialogue and literary portraiture.  The following works treat philosophical issues.  Counsels of a Mother to her Son analyzes the moral virtues an aristocratic man must develop; Counsels of a Mother to her Daughter examines the moral virtues essential for the aristocratic woman.  Treatise on Friendship studies the power and difficulty of ethical friendship.  Treatise on Old Age laments the neglect of the elderly in contemporary society.  Reflections on Wealth decries materialism.  Reflections on Taste and Discourse on the Delicacy of Mind and of Sentiment examine aesthetic judgment.  Psyche analyzes the nature of the human soul.  Dialogue between Alexander and Diogenes criticizes the false glory represented by warriors such as Alexander the Great.

The philosophical influences on Lambert are not difficult to identify.  Since her childhood, Lambert carefully noted striking phrases from her reading.  In many of her writings, she uses quotations to justify her argument.  Two groups of thinkers predominate.  The first are classical authors with a marked Stoic orientation: Plutarch, Seneca, Marcus Aurelius, and Cicero.  The second are contemporary French authors often considered moralistes, because of their exploration of moral psychology, especially the deceptions of the human mind.  Prominent in this second group are Montaigne, La Rochefoucauld, La Bruyère, Pascal, Fénelon and Saint-Evremond.  So frequent is Lambert’s use of quotation that some critics have dismissed her writings as a tissue of paraphrases.  But Lambert transforms her sources to accommodate her own concerns, notably her concern about the status of women.  Lambert cites Cicero’s dissertation on old age but her own essay contains considerations on the impoverishment of aging women that are absent in Cicero.  Similarly, the marquise admits the debt of her Counsels of a Mother to her Daughter to Fénelon’s Education of Girls but nowhere does Fénelon develop the argument for the philosophical education of women which Lambert pursues in her own text.

3. Philosophical Themes


Madame Lambert’s writings focus on philosophical themes that preoccupied the more intellectual Parisian salons of the period.  In her discussion of the virtues, she makes careful distinctions on the various types of moral virtue, with particular interest in the aristocratic virtue of glory.  Like other salonnières, she analyzes the gradations of love and constructs an apology for chaste, intellectual love between adults of the opposite sex.  Lambert’s interest in pedagogy springs from the conviction that formation in virtue constitutes the chief purpose of education.  Despite her loyalty to the French throne, she criticizes the social injustices of French society, especially its unequal distribution of material wealth, and condemns what she considers the major vices of her own social class.  Her philosophical reflections on art focus primarily on the subjective issue of aesthetic appreciation, notably taste and delicacy.  A practicing Catholic, she develops a religious philosophy more attuned to the emerging deism of the period.  God is the Supreme Being affirmed by rational reflection on the cosmos rather than the personal redeemer known through revelation and grace.  Relatively secondary, the virtues of religion are assimilated to the more generic moral virtues of moderation, prudence, and integrity.  Lambert’s works develop a gendered philosophy not only because they defend the dignity of women against the misogyny of the period, but because they treat such issues as friendship, education, and old age through the lens of gender differentiation.

a. Virtue Theory

Lambert’s intertwined theories of virtue and education emerge in her two most popular works, Counsels of a Mother to her Son and Counsels of a Mother to her Daughter.  In both works, Lambert exhorts her children to grow in virtue as they leave adolescence and begin the commitments of adulthood.  She praises the moral habits they have already acquired through their earlier formal education and advises them on the moral dispositions they must obtain in the future.  But the virtues central for men are not the same as those vital for women.  Like other men, especially those of the nobility destined for military service, her son must pursue glory and its associated public virtues.  Like other women, destined primarily for household duties, her daughter should cultivate the more hidden virtues clustered around humility.

For men, the acquisition of the virtue of glory constitutes their highest aspiration.  According to Lambert, society has rightly named military valor as the chief title to this virtue.  “The glory of heroes is the most brilliant.  True marks of honor and acclaim are attached to it.  Renown seems personally designed for these men.”  In pursuing such glory, men must refuse to limit their ambition through a constraining personal modesty.  In fact, such ambition is necessary for gentlemen pursuing glory as long as they refrain from unfair attacks on their enemies or rivals.  Lambert conceives the virtue of glory as central to political as well as personal masculine development.  Political order is founded on a social contract using the aspiration to glory as a guarantor of civic cohesion.  “Men found that it was necessary and useful for them to unite together for the sake of the common good.  They made laws to punish the evil.  They agreed among themselves what constituted the basic duties of society and attached the idea of glory to the proper practice of these duties.”

The pursuit of grandeur in the military and broader civic forum requires men to develop other social virtues.  Like other salonnières of the period, Lambert emphasizes the virtue of honesty (honnêteté), a personal integrity that permits the gentleman to witness the needs of others and to serve them without excessive preoccupation.  “If you want to be a perfectly honest man, consider disciplining your self-love and give it a good object.  Honesty consists in emptying oneself of focusing on one’s own rights and in respecting the rights of others.”  Unlike true glory, with its attendant concern for others, false glory encourages self-gratification and ignores the misery of the other.  “Why is it that in this infinite number of desires fabricated by voluptuousness and indulgence one never finds the desire to provide relief for the unfortunate?  Doesn’t simple humanity make one feel the need to aid one’s fellow humans?  Moral hearts feel more greatly the obligation to do good than they do the other necessities of life.”  For Lambert, the cultivation of this altruistic honesty naturally entails the pursuit of other similarly discreet social virtues: politeness, tact, delicacy, and wisdom. Such honesty preserves the gentleman from the typical moral vices of the courtier: envy and avarice.

Unlike men, women are not called to cultivate the social virtues proper to the political sphere; they should develop virtues more appropriate to the domestic sphere of the household.  “Women are not called to partake in visible and brilliant virtues; rather, they pursue simple and quiet virtues.”  Glory, the central virtue of men, has no role in the retired life of women.  “The virtues of women are difficult because glory does not help to practice them.  These virtues are hidden: living with oneself; limiting one’s government to one’s family; being simple, just, and modest.”  Among other virtues of self-effacement, women are called to pursue humility and temperance.  Like the opposite sex, women must cultivate the virtues of honesty and politeness, but their participation in the civic sphere remains more circumscribed than that assigned by Lambert to men.

Despite this limitation of female moral culture to the province of the household, Lambert argues that women must develop a substantial set of intellectual virtues.  She insists that women should maintain an intellectual curiosity that leads to a lifetime of learning.  “Curiosity is knowledge that has already begun; it will make one go faster and further in the path of truth.  It is a natural inclination which goes beyond formal instruction.  It must not be stopped by sloth or soft living.” The educational program commended by Lambert for her daughter indicates the substantial intellectual culture Lambert considers desirable for aristocratic women.  The program includes the study of Greek, Roman, and French history; the study of ethics through the writings of Cicero and Pliny; the study of literature, especially the tragedies of Corneille; and the study of Latin.  Lambert adds a Cartesian note to this ambitious neoclassical curriculum by her approval of the study of philosophy.  “[I commend] especially the new sort [of philosophy], if one is capable of it; it will cultivate precision in one’s mind, clarify one’s thoughts, and teach one to think correctly.”  This apology for serious intellectual, specifically philosophical, formation for women is allied to the critique of the neglect of women’s education with which she opens Counsels of a Mother to her Daughter.  “Throughout time we have neglected the education of women; we only paid attention to that of men.  We acted as if women were a different kind of species.  We abandoned them to themselves without any assistance and without the slightest consideration that they constitute half of the world.”

Despite this gendered differentiation in the treatment of the moral virtues, men and women are summoned to develop one virtue in common: the capacity to live by oneself and to rely on one’s own rational judgment.  This neo-Stoic ability to find interior rational peace is the key to mature happiness for both sexes.  Counsels of a Mother to her Son describes this virtue as “the happiness of knowing how to live with oneself, to find oneself with pleasure, to leave oneself with regret.”  In Counsels of a Mother to her Daughter, Lambert exhorts her daughter to “learn that the greatest science is to know how to be alone with yourself….Provide yourself with an interior place of retreat or asylum.  There you can always return to yourself and find yourself.”  In this contemplative self-possession, wherein the passions are subordinated to reason, both men and women discover the interior resources to combat the vicissitudes of existence, especially of reversal of fortune.

b. Gender and Dignity

In New Reflections On Women, Lambert provides an apology for the dignity and rights of women.  The essay criticizes the misogyny which has denied women a proper education.  “Can’t women say to men, ‘What right do you have to forbid us to study the sciences and fine arts?  Haven’t women who have devoted themselves to these disciplines produced both sublime and useful objects?’”  As contemporary examples of such success, the essay cites Madame de la Sablière, an astronomer, and the many recent women novelists.  Lambert laments the decline of the salons which had earlier contributed to the artistic and philosophical formation of women.  “In other times there were houses where it was permitted to speak and to think, where the Muses held company with the Graces….These houses were like the Banquet of Plato.”  The social constitution which reduces women to inferiors and denies them the possibility of scientific culture does not reflect nature or rights; it is simply a corporate act of violence by men to retain their supremacy and to maintain the domestic services of women without appropriate compensation.  “By force rather than by natural right, men have usurped authority over women.”  The period’s art, notably Molière’s parody of the précieuses in Women Scholars, conspires to persuade women that their legal subjection and exclusion from serious education is a product of nature rather than of culpable oppression.

Despite her critique of the period’s subjection of women, Lambert accepts the common argument that the difference between the genders is psychological and not only biological.  In particular, she accepts the argument advanced by Malebranche that women have a more active faculty of imagination than do men.  But whereas Malebranche and others had drawn the conclusion that this hyperactive imagination prevents women from exercising reason (and concomitantly from governing others), Lambert draws the opposite conclusion.  The essay claims that women’s natural vivacity of imagination and sentiment actually perfects the operations of reason.  Rather than being the antagonist of reason, imagination incites reason to undertake great projects and makes the fruits of reasoning more persuasive to the public.  “I do not think that sentiment weakens the mind; on the contrary, it provides new spiritual powers which illuminate the mind.  It makes the ideas present in the mind livelier, clearer, and more distinct….Persuasion of the heart is higher than that of the mind alone because our conduct often depends on the former.  It is to our imagination and to our heart that nature has committed the conduct of our actions and of its motives.”  Rather than being inferior to men, women appear to possess a certain mental superiority.  The success of ancient and contemporary women in the arts and sciences indicates that they are as capable as are men in pursuing intellectual activities.  Only social prejudice, expressed through the denial of appropriate education, explains the comparative paucity of women who have distinguished themselves in these fields.  The alleged greater attachment of women to the exercise of the imagination and of the sentiments in their decision-making only indicates that in an atmosphere free of gender prejudice women will exercise reason with a greater complement of imagery and of passion than do most men.

c. Ethics of Love

In several works, Lambert focuses on the central issue of salon debate: the nature of love.  She insists on the moral qualities necessary for authentic love and decries the descent into sexual debauchery that has characterized several prominent salons of the Regency.  The chaste love of mature friendship is both more desirable and more difficult to attain than is the passion-based love of romance.  Intellectual love between adults of the opposite sex constitutes the apex of this ideal moral friendship.

New Reflections on Women defines love as the central sentiment of human life.  Due to its interiority and its power, love enjoys a primacy among human sentiments.  “The difference between love and other pleasures is easy to detect for those who have been touched by it.  In order to be felt, most pleasures require the presence of the proper external object.  Music, cuisine, and theater are examples of pleasures that must have their immediate object in order to make their impressions, to call the soul to them and to hold the soul attentive….It is not the same with love.  It is within us, it is a part of ourselves.  It does not only exist in tandem with its corresponding object; we can experience love without the presence of the object.”  The superiority of love over other desires springs from the capacity of its sentiments to dominate the moral agent even in the absence of the beloved other person.  Memory and imagination deepen the force of a sentimental state that can captivate the human subject on the basis of fantasy alone.

Despite Lambert’s correlation of love with pleasure, Treatise on Friendship underscores that the highest form of love is disinterested friendship among peers rather than romantic affection.  Such mature friendship is based on virtue rather than passion.  “The first merit we must seek in our friends is virtue.  This is what assures us that they are capable and worthy of friendship.  We should expect nothing from our relationships which lack this foundation.”  Focused on the needs of the other, authentic friendship frees one from self-preoccupation and encourages altruistic service of the beloved.  “Friendship is a relationship, a contract, or a type of reciprocal commitment where one demands nothing, where the most worthy person gives more than is expected and is happy to do so in advance.  One shares one’s fortune with one’s friend: wealth, credit, concern, services, everything except one’s honor.”  Only in this virtuous friendship is the human person freed from the calculation of conquest and approval which characterizes most interpersonal affection.

Departing from its classical precedents, Treatise on Friendship argues that such a virtuous, altruistic friendship is not limited to peers of the same sex.  Chaste, intellectual friendship between members of the opposite sex constitutes the highest embodiment of such a meritorious relationship since it demands strict discipline of one’s personal passions.  “They ask if friendship can endure among members of different sex.   Although it is rare and difficult, this is the most delightful of friendships.  It is the most difficult because it requires more virtue and more restraint.”  At its apogee in altruistic friendship, the sentiment of love is so thoroughly refined by the rational will that the passions can no longer distort it.

d. Social Criticism

Like other moralistes of the period, Lambert criticizes the injustices of French society.  Economic inequality constitutes one of the principal injustices of this highly stratified society.  Avarice constitutes the major vice of an aristocracy transformed into avid courtiers.

Reflections on Wealth describes the rapacious efforts to acquire material wealth as a distortion of the human quest for happiness.  Whereas human beings can only find authentic happiness in the intellectual and moral goods of the soul, the social elite seeks an illusory happiness in the amassment of ever-increasing fortunes.  Such wealth may procure social approval and temporary pleasure, but the illusory nature of this unstable pleasure inevitably manifests itself.  “Riches are vain in their use and insatiable in their possession of us.  They are vain because of the false idea they give of themselves.  This idea is founded not on our real being but on our imaginary being.  Everything surrounding those favored with wealth serves their illusions.”  This illusion magnifies the egocentrism of a humanity marked by the fall.  Other people, even the earth itself (with its deposits of precious metals), become objects which exist to be exploited by and to adorn an aristocracy poisoned by avarice.

Despite its moral tares, this human avidity possesses a certain public utility.  The desire to be admired for one’s wealth-related grandeur drives many of the wealthy to provide a material assistance toward the poor which they would not otherwise give.  “Nothing is so great and nothing gives us such an illustrious position in the imagination of others as does the contribution of our wealth to the public weal.  Making one’s wealth flow to so many unfortunates is to give them a new type of existence which pulls them out of their desperate state.”  Like many social thinkers of the eighteenth-century, Lambert identifies material self-interest as the motor of public philanthropy.

Lambert’s critique of the intolerable lot of the poor in contemporary French society becomes explicitly gendered in her Treatise of Old Age.  It is women who bear the brunt of the material impoverishment and psychological isolation of old age.  “Throughout their lives, we have given men all the assistance necessary to perfect their reason and to teach them the great science of happiness.  Cicero composed a treatise on old age to help them draw benefits from an age where everything seems to leave us.  We do this work only for men.  For women in all ages, on the contrary, we simply abandon them to themselves.  We neglect their education in their youth.  During the rest of their lives, we deprive them of the support they need for their old age.  As a result, the majority of women live without care and without the ability to reflect on their state.  In their youth they are vain and dissipated; in their old age, frail and disheveled.”  It is the deprivation of education, especially of the methodical formation of reason and of the capacity for personal reflection, which provokes the material and psychological impoverishment of women, once their romantic and maternal utility has vanished.  The result of neither nature nor accident, this impoverishment of aging women reflects the gender imbalance of a society centered around the needs of men.

e. Religious Philosophy

Lambert’s writings exhibit the nascent deism of the period.  Although she repeatedly praises the virtue of piety, Lambert accords religious virtues a palpably secondary role in the constellation of moral virtues she commends to her readers.  Religion provides a cornerstone for the moral virtues the human person must cultivate, but the deity presiding over this religious theology is the deist Supreme Being rather than the biblical God of redemption and grace.

The deistic character of Lambert’s religious philosophy appears clearly in her Counsels of a Mother to her Son.  Although she insists that the greatest duty of the son is to “render worship to the Supreme Being,” this religious sentiment is markedly constricted.  The purpose of religion is to inspire the moral agent to fulfill his or her duties.  Prayer is an occasion to compare oneself with the moral order God has manifested in the cosmos.  “Moral virtues are in danger without the Christian ones.  I do not ask from you a piety full of weaknesses and superstition; I only ask that a love of moral order would submit to God your inclinations and your sentiments and that the same love of order would spill over on your conduct.  That will give you justice and the presence of justice will guarantee the existence of all the virtues.”  Religion is instrumentalized as an efficacious tool of moral formation and motivation.  Communion with God is based not on grace but on rational scrutiny of one’s conformity to the moral order detectable in nature.  It is the natural virtue of justice, and not the supernatural virtues of faith, hope, and charity, which constitutes the apex of the moral virtues fostered by an enlightened religiosity shorn of irrationality and superstition.

The religious virtue praised by Lambert is generic in nature.  Respect for religion entails respect for the particular religion established by the sovereign of the state.  “One does not attack religion when one has no interest in attacking it.  Nothing makes one happier than having the mind convinced and the heart touched by religion.  That is a good in all times.  Even those who are not fortunate enough to believe as they choose should submit to the established religion.  They know that what is called ‘prejudice’ has great standing in society and that it must be respected.”   The treatment of religious truth in this passage is markedly skeptical.  The assimilation of religion to a popular ‘prejudice’ is not refuted; it is simply useful to respect such a widespread belief, even if it is tainted by custom and bias.  The particular religion to be respected and embraced varies from one society to another, since it is the religious confession established by the state.  In France, this is Catholicism defended by the monarchy, but in other cultures this can easily be another religious confession whose tenets are enforced by a different type of political sovereignty.

Other writings, notably Counsels of a Mother to Daughter and Treatise on Old Age, commend the virtue of piety to women.  But despite the occasional Christian references, the religious sentiment lauded by Lambert remains closer to rationalist deism than to the Catholic sentiment of adoration and submission rooted in grace.

f. Aesthetics

In several works, Lambert studies the subjective dimension of aesthetics.  She explores how the taste for beauty develops in the human mind.  She also studies the related mental qualities of delicacy and refinement, which permit the human person to recognize beauty in nature or in artifacts.

Reflections on Taste concedes an irreducible subjectivity to the phenomenon of taste.  Whereas discursive reasoning inevitably leads to certain conclusions according to the rules of logic and of evidence, judgments of taste often evince irresolvable contradictions.  “Taste is the first movement and a type of instinct which draws us and guides us more surely than all the work of reason.  There is no necessary agreement among tastes.  This is not the same thing as among truths.  It is obvious that whoever concedes my premises will also agree with the consequences I draw.  In this way one may lead an intelligent person to accept one’s opinion, but one is never sure that one can lead a sensitive person to one’s judgment of taste.  There are no links or enticements to make someone else agree with this judgment.  Nothing is certain in the domain of taste; everything springs from the disposition of one’s interior organs and the relationship established between them and external objects.”  Despite its power over the human person’s judgment, taste delivers subjective judgments inasmuch as it depends on the physiology and the psychology unique to each person in the exercise of aesthetic perception.

Despite this subjective dimension, the essay insists that some judgments of taste are more justified than are others.   Although taste eludes analytic definition, it can be evoked intuitively for those who have experienced the difference in quality of aesthetic judgments.  “Right taste delivers a proper judgment on everything we call pleasing, satisfying, fitting, fine, or, so to speak, the flora of the soul.  It is this je ne sais quoi of wisdom and of skillfulness, which knows what is appropriate and which senses in each object the correct proportion it must possess.”  Although judgments of taste do not follow the strict logic of discursive reason, they are not arbitrary.  Irreducible to a formula, experience indicates that certain minds excel in the recognition of the obscure formal qualities that constitute the beauty of an external object.

Against emotivism and relativism, Lambert argues that the faculty of taste possesses a partial intellectual dimension.  “Up to the present, good taste has been defined as ‘a custom established for the members of high society who are sophisticated and discriminating.’  I think that good taste depends on two things: a sentiment of great delicacy in the heart and a great correctness in the mind.”  If Lambertian taste begins as a subjective movement of instinct and feeling, it only reaches its mature term when the intellect has refined this initial impression through a scrutiny of the formal qualities, especially the harmony and balance, of the external object under consideration.

g. Cartesianism

Lambert’s writings make few explicit references to Descartes, but her writings are suffused with Cartesian philosophy.  Although the degree of her personal knowledge of the texts of Descartes remains unclear, Lambert clearly imbibed the pervasive Cartesianism of the salons, militantly diffused in her own salon by Fontenelle.

The literary portrait Monsieur de la Motte provides a Cartesian definition of philosophy.  “To philosophize is to render to reason all its dignity and to make it enter into its rights.  It is to relate each object to its proper principles.  It is to shake off the yoke of opinion and of authority.”  In its attack on public opinion and appeals to authority as the antonym of right reason, this rationalist concept of philosophy clearly follows the path of Cartesianism.

In several works, this Cartesian apology for reason warns the reader of the dangers of reliance on public opinion.  Counsels of a Mother to her Daughter emphasizes the necessity to abandon prejudice, custom, and public opinion if one seeks to reason properly.  “Give yourself a true idea of things.  Don’t judge like the common people do.  Don’t yield your judgment to that of public opinion.  Throw off the prejudices of childhood.”  Similarly, the Dialogue between Alexander and Diogenes on the Equality of Goods condemns Alexander the Great’s reliance on the esteem of the public.  “I know very well that you [Alexander] have the masses for you.  The number of the wise is very small.  As much as you are a prince, you are still a man of the common people in your way of thinking.  Always dependant on the opinion of other people, you place your happiness in the judgments of others.”   It is Diogenes, the representative of the intellectual elite which relies on reason rather than on fluctuating public opinion, who has access to the truth.

Lambert’s Cartesian orientation often emerges in her treatment of specific areas of human endeavor.  Counsels of a Mother to Her Son considers history, focused on human passions and chance events, as inferior to the study of metaphysics, where the student can discover universal, immutable principles.  “Your ordinary reading must be history, but you must join reflection to it.  Don’t think of filling your memory with facts, of decorating your mind with the thoughts and opinions of authors.  This would only turn your mind into a store filled with the ideas of other people.  A quarter of an hour of reflection does more to deepen and form the mind than do hours of reading.  You should not fear a lack of knowledge; rather, you should fear error and false judgments.  Reflection is the guide leading to truth.”  Counsels of a Mother to her Daughter closely follows Descartes’s Discourse on Method in its exemption of religion from the rationalist censure of appeals to authority.  “In the area of religion, one must yield to authorities, but on every other subject, one must only accept the authority of reason and of evidence.”  As a result of this split in warrants between religious and non-religious knowledge, theological belief becomes a matter of arational assent.  “As a great man [Malebranche] said, ‘To be a Christian, one must believe blindly; to be wise, one must see the evidence.”  In this Cartesian framework, reason is not only to be exercised in metaphysics and science to discover indubitable, immutable principles; it is be used in other areas of human life to eliminate or at least to temper the weight of authority and custom on human judgment.

4. Reception and Interpretation

The reception of Madame de Lambert’s writings and philosophy has been checkered.  In the eighteenth century a large, cultivated European public purchased numerous editions of her works in French, English, German, and Spanish.  French Enlightenment philosophers, notably Bayle, Fontenelle, Montesquieu, and Voltaire, praised her contribution to moral philosophy.  By the late nineteenth century, however, Lambert was little read.  It is significant that the first twentieth-century edition of Lambert’s works occurred only at the very end of the century (1990) with Granderoute’s critical edition.

Several factors explain the eclipse of Lambert’s philosophy.  First, the marquise wrote in the style of literary miniatures that were popular in the salons of the period.  She often expressed her philosophy in the genre of the essay, the literary dialogue, the maxim, or the literary portrait.  Genres that appeared charming in the boudoirs of the Regency often appeared precious to a later literary public.  Written outside the framework of the systematic treatise, the essays’ arguments on virtue or politics or aesthetics often seemed unphilosophical to a later philosophical public accustomed to university norms of academic argument.

Second, Madame de Lambert wrote from and for a philosophical culture which has vanished.  She could presume that her listeners had studied the Stoicism of Plutarch and Cicero in their schooldays as she had.  Even indirect references to the classical authors would be immediately grasped.  Paraphrases of Montaigne or Pascal required no further explanation.  Any educated Frenchman or Frenchwoman in the early eighteenth century would possess at least a hazy outline of the skepticism represented by each of these masters of modern French prose.

The recent renaissance of philosophical interest in Lambert is tied to the neo-feminist expansion of the cannon of the humanities in early modernity.  Several recent studies focus on the question of gender and the status of women in Lambert.  The interpretations offered by Fassiotto (1984) and Beasely (1992) illustrate this tendency.  Other contributions by Lambert to moral philosophy, such as her virtue theory and her critique of the influence of popular opinion on moral judgment, await further research.

5. References and Further Reading

All translations from French to English above are by the author of this article.

a. Primary Sources

  • Lambert, Anne-Thérèse de Marguenat de Courcelles, marquise de. Oeuvres complètes de madame la marquise de Lambert. Paris: L. Collin, 1808.
    • A digital version of this edition of the works of Madame de Lambert is available at Gallica: bibliothèque numérique on the website of the Bibliothèque nationale de France.
  • Lambert, Anne-Thérèse de Marguenat de Courcelles, marquise de. Oeuvres, ed. Robert Granderoute. Paris: Librairie Honoré Champion, 1990.
    • This excellent critical edition of the works of Madame de Lambert has become the standard scholarly edition.
  • Lambert, Ann-Thérèse de Marguenat de Courcelles, marquise de. The Works of the Marchionesse de Lambert. Containing Thoughts on various entertaining and useful Subjects, Reflections on Education, on the writings of Homer and on various public Events of the Time. Carefully Translated from the French. London: William Owen, 1749.
    • This first English translation of the collected works of Madame de Lambert underwent four re-editions in the eighteenth century.  Digital texts of the English versions of several of Lambert’s works can be found at the following Internet sites: American Libraries Internet Archive and Google Book Search.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Barth-Cao Danh, Michèle. La philosophie cognitive et morale d’Anne-Thérèse de Lambert, 1647-1733: La volonté d’être. New York: Peter Lang, 2002.
    • This original monograph studies the epistemology of Madame de Lambert.
  • Beasely, Faith. “Anne-Thérèse de Lambert and the Politics of Taste,” Papers on French Seventeenth Century Literature, 1992, Vol. 19; no.37: 337-44.
    • The article focuses on gender in its analysis of aesthetic judgment and politics in Lambert.
  • Daniélou, Catherine. “L’amour-propre éclairé: Madame de Lambert et Pierre Nicole,” Papers on French Seventeenth Century Literature, 1995, Vol. 22, no. 42: 171-83.
    • [Daniélou contrasts the link between self-love and social utility in the philosophies of Lambert and of the Jansenist Nicole
  • Fassiotto, Marie-José. Madame de Lambert (1644-1733), ou, Le féminism moral. New York: Peter Lang, 1984.
    • Fassiotto explores gender issues in Lambert but the attribution of feminism is anachronistic.
  • Granderoute, Robert. “Madame de Lambert et Montaigne,” Bulletin de la Société des Amis de Montaigne, 1981, nos. 7-8: 97-106.
    • Granderoute demonstrates the dependence of Lambert on the thought and texts of Montaigne.
  • Granderoute, Robert. “De l’Education des filles aux Avis d’une mère à une fille: Fénelon et madame de Lambert,” Revue d’Histoire littéraire de la France,” 1987, no. 1: 15-30.
    • Granderoute examines the influence of Fénelon on Lambert’s educational philosophy.
  • Hine, Ellen McNiven. Madame de Lambert, her Sources and her Circle. Oxford: The Voltaire Foundation, 1973.
    • Hine studies Lambert’s ancient and contemporary intellectual sources.
  • Hoffman, Paul. “Madame de Lambert et l’exigence de dignité,” Travaux de linguistique et de littérature, 1973, vol. 11, no. 2: 19-32.
    • Hoffman analyzes the central concept of dignity in the ethics and political thought of Lambert.
  • Kryssing-Berg, Ginette, “La marquise de Lambert ou l’ambivalence de la vertu,” Revue Romane, 1982, Vol. 17: 35-45.
    • Kryssing-Berg studies the tension between virtue and social utility in Lambert’s ethics.
  • Marchal, Roger. Madame de Lambert et son milieu. Oxford: The Voltaire Foundation, 1991.
    • Marchal examines the aristocratic and salon context of Lambert’s thought.

Author Information

John J. Conley
Loyola University in Maryland
U. S. A.

Françoise d’Aubigné, marquise de Maintenon (1635—1719)

maintenonThe second wife of King Louis XIV of France, Madame de Maintenon has long fascinated historians and novelists by her improbable life.  Born into an impoverished, criminal family, Maintenon conquered salon society as the wife of the poet Paul Scarron. During her salon years, she studied the philosophical currents of the period, notably libertinism and Cartesianism.  Maintenon then conquered court society as the governess of the illegitimate children of King Louis XIV and finally as the wife of the widowed King. The controversies surrounding her social ascent have long obscured the contributions of Maintenon to educational and moral philosophy. The founder and director of the celebrated school for women at Saint-Cyr, Maintenon defended her theories of education for women in a series of addresses to the Saint-Cyr faculty. In her pedagogical philosophy, practical moral formation rather than intellectual cultivation emerges as the primary goal of schooling.  Her dramatic dialogues and addresses to students developed her distinctive moral philosophy, based on detailed analysis of the moral virtues to be cultivated by the pupils.  In her account of the cardinal virtues, temperance holds pride of place. Addressing Saint-Cyr’s student body of aristocratic girls and women, Maintenon devoted particular attention to the virtues of civility essential for polite society. Her philosophy of virtues is a gendered one inasmuch as Maintenon attempted to redefine traditionally masculine virtues in terms of current female experience.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Works
  3. Philosophical Themes
    1. Philosophy of Education
    2. Virtue Theory
    3. Virtue and Gender
    4. Virtue and Class
  4. Reception and Interpretation
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Biography

Françoise d’Augbigné was born on November 27-28, 1635, allegedly in the prison of Niort in central France.  Her father Constant d’Aubigné was a career criminal who had received jail terms for murder, kidnapping, treason, and debt.  Disowned by his father Agrippa d’Aubigné, a prominent Huguenot military officer and poet, Constant d’Aubigné had married Jeanne de Cardhilac, daughter of Niort’s prison warden, in 1627.  Françoise’s harrowing childhood included a stay in Martinique (1645-1647) during one of her father’s failed political adventures; a bitter stay with a distant relative who used her as a domestic servant (1648); tempestuous periods at Ursuline convent schools in Niort and Paris (1648); and a painful return to her impoverished mother (1649-1652), during which time the young Françoise was forced to beg in the streets.  A personal witness to the religious divisions of the period, she was baptized Catholic by her mother at birth, raised as a Protestant by her kindly aunt, Madame de Villette, and then converted to Catholicism by her Ursuline teachers.  The adolescent study of Plutarch introduced her to the period’s vogue for Stoicism and cultivated her lifelong taste for the literature of moral edification.

In 1652 Françoise d’Aubigné married her only suitor: the poet Paul Scarron.  The odd match became an object of ridicule in the Parisian salons.  Twenty-five years her senior, Scarron was a paralyzed, impotent satirist renowned for the vitriol of his verse burlesques.  Despite its unpromising origins, the marriage proved a reasonable success.  Madame Scarron patiently nursed a sickly husband who visibly esteemed his beautiful and intelligent young wife.  The tiny apartment of the Scarrons quickly became a salon for Parisian authors of a libertine bent.  Madame Scarron acquired a philosophical culture from the salon habitués: Benserade, Chapelain, Vivonne, Saint-Aignan, Costar, and Ménage.  She was especially influenced by George Brossin, chevalier de Méré, the essayist who argued that the honnête homme, the temperate person who exercised restraint in arriving at judgments, should be the moral ideal of an age exhausted by religious fanaticism.  During these salon sessions Madame Scarron also read and debated the works of Descartes.

At the death of her husband in 1660, Madame Scarron faced a precarious future, but her salon contacts permitted her to find some financial support and to continue her pursuit of literary and philosophical culture.  In 1669 she accepted a delicate mission: to serve as the governess for the illegitimate children of Louis XIV and her fellow salonnière, Madame de Montespan.  Her skillful education of the children impressed the king and his stormy mistress.  Her expert nursing of their son, the Duke of Maine, during a serious illness appeared to them miraculous.  In 1674, a grateful Louis XIV granted the devoted governess the lands and title of the fief of Maintenon.  Newly ennobled and financially secure, Madame de Maintenon now took her own place as a titled aristocrat among the courtiers of Versailles.  When the affair between Louis XIV and Madame de Montespan collapsed, Maintenon encouraged the king to reconcile with his estranged wife, Marie-Thérèse of Austria.  The successful reconciliation between the spouses enhanced Maintenon’s standing in court but earned her the enmity of her old patron, Madame de Montespan.

After the sudden death of Queen Marie-Thérèse on July 9, 1683, the king drew closer to Maintenon.  On October 9, 1683, the archbishop of Paris married the couple in a private ceremony.  The bride’s modest social origins raised a problem, since Louis XIV had insisted on dynastic marriages for other members of his family.  The marriage was never publicly announced, although the court quickly perceived that Madame de Maintenon had assumed the role and duties of Louis XIV’s legitimate wife.  The private marriage was also morganatic; Maintenon would never assume the title of queen and no relative of hers could claim the right to the throne.

In 1684 Maintenon began her life’s work: the construction of a school for the education of daughters of the impoverished nobility.  Situated in 1686 at Saint-Cyr, the Institute of Saint Louis was generously subsidized by Louis XIV.  Maintenon personally supervised the direction of the school, designed to serve two hundred and fifty students.  The school possessed a comparatively sophisticated curriculum, featuring courses in religion, reading, writing, mathematics, Latin, music, painting, dancing, needlework, and home economics.  Dissatisfied with the narrowly religious education provided by the convent schools of the period, Maintenon founded her own lay group of teachers, the Dames of Saint-Louis, to provide instruction.  Maintenon insisted that dialogue rather than lecture was to be the primary means of education in the Saint-Cyr classroom.

Saint-Cyr underwent three distinct periods in its pedagogical development.  In its artistic period (1686-1689), the school emphasized cultural achievement by its students.  Sophisticated concerts, plays, debates, and liturgical services soon attracted a prestigious Parisian public.  The artistic period achieved its culmination in the world premiere of Jean Racine’s Esther on January 26, 1689.  The cultural triumph of the school, however, created educational problems.  Dazzled by the applause of the court, students began to neglect their studies; class time began to shrink in favor of rehearsals for the elaborate school performances.

During its mystical period (1690-97), Maintenon sought to combat the worldliness of the earlier artistic phase by promoting piety in the school.  The faculty and students soon fell under the influence of Madame de Guyon, a controversial religious leader and friend of Maintenon.  The Quietism promoted by Guyon stressed simplicity in prayer, confidence in God, and retirement from the world.  Maintenon grew disenchanted with a piety that seemed to undercut the acquisition of virtue and ardor in one’s studies and future work.  By the middle of the decade, Maintenon encouraged Louis XIV’s campaign against Quietism and the expulsion of faculty sympathetic to Quietism.

By the end of the seventeenth century, Maintenon had guided Saint-Cyr toward the pedagogical model she would support until her death.  This approach to education stressed the acquisition of moral virtues by the students and development of the practical skills these impoverished women would need in their future lives as wives of provincial aristocrats in straitened financial circumstances.  This practical mode of education, with its distinctive moralistic coloration, would remain the guiding ethos of Saint-Cyr until its dissolution by revolutionaries in 1793.

Given the secret nature of her marriage, Maintenon’s influence on the court of Louis XIV remained a discreet one.  She clearly counseled her husband on religious matters, especially the appointment of bishops and abbots, but her role in the Revocation of the Edict of Nantes and the intensification of anti-Protestant measures by Louis XIV has been exaggerated by later critics.  Her primary interest remained the direction of the school at Saint-Cyr, to which she retired in 1715, shortly after the death of Louis XIV.

Madame de Maintenon died at Saint-Cyr on April 17, 1719.

2. Works

The majority of the works left by Madame de Maintenon originated during her tenure at the Institute of Saint Louis (1686-1719).  The Dames of Saint-Louis carefully transcribed the many addresses Maintenon delivered to the faculty and student body.  Maintenon would then correct and revise the transcriptions.  In addition, she composed dramatic monologues to be performed in class.  The Dames collected these various texts of Madame de Maintenon into a series of manuscript collections, the last and largest of which date from 1740.  In addition, a massive correspondence of over five thousand letters written by Maintenon has survived.  Théophile Lavallée’s multi-volume edition of Maintenon’s writings (1854-66) remains the most thorough print edition of Maintenon, but we remain far from a complete – let alone a critical – edition of her works.

Of particular philosophical importance are the writings where Maintenon treats ethical issues, especially the nature of virtue and vice.  Her Entretiens are conferences with the Saint-Cyr faculty in which Maintenon emphasizes the formation in virtue that is the principal end of education at the school.  Her Instructions are addresses to the students in which she censures the typical vices and exalts the ideal virtues of the student body.  Her Conversations (dialogues) are brief morality plays that define and illustrate the major virtues the student must inculcate.  Maintenon’s approach to ethics is gendered inasmuch as she redefines the virtues and vices, originally defined in terms of male experience, in the framework of typical women’s experience.  Her approach is also class-conscious, since she attempts to redefine the virtues in the perspective of women who are simultaneously aristocratic and impoverished.

3. Philosophical Themes

The primary philosophical interest of Maintenon’s works lies in its treatment of two related topics: educational theory and virtue theory.  For Maintenon, the primary goal of education is the formation of the moral character of the pupil, interpreted according to the canons of Counter-reformational Catholicism.  The secondary goal is vocational formation.  In the case of Saint-Cyr, it is the development of the skills and the moral habits of the pupil who faces the future as a member of the impoverished, provincial nobility.  Maintenon transforms the nature of moral virtue according to the demands of gender and social class.  Traditionally masculine virtues, such as courage, are redefined to serve as the ideal ethical traits of the industrious wife largely confined to the domestic sphere.  Virtues typical of the aristocratic class, notably politeness and civility, are raised to the status of primary moral dispositions.

a. Philosophy of Education

In her addresses to the faculty of Saint-Cyr, Maintenon sketches her philosophy of education.  The ends of education are traditional: the formation of moral character for a Catholic member of the provincial aristocracy.  But the dialogical methods of pedagogy championed by Maintenon exhibit a distinctive modernity.

Of Solid Education explains the educational end of Saint-Cyr for the faculty: “You [the teachers] apply yourself to developing the piety, the reason, and the morals of your girls.  You inspire in them the love and practices of all virtues proper to them now and in the future.”  Maintenon insists that the virtue to be cultivated and the means used to achieve this ethical culture must always be “reasonable,” but this reasonableness is of a practical rather than speculative nature.  Of the Education of Young Ladies specifies how this practical reasonableness differs from erudition or aesthetic achievement: “You [the teachers] should concern yourself less with furnishing their mind than with forming their reason.  Obviously, this approach provides less occasion for the knowledge and skill of the schoolmistress to sparkle.  A young woman who has memorized a thousand things impresses her family and friends more than does a girl who simply knows how to exercise her judgment, when to be silent, how to be modest and reserved, how to avoid rushing into showing what she thinks about something.”  This pedagogical ideal of practical reasonableness underscores the primacy Maintenon accords the virtues of discretion and restraint for aristocratic women, who are often plunged into dangerous political controversies.  It also expresses the mature Maintenon’s disillusionment with the aesthetic and mystical ideals that had earlier served as the educational end of Saint-Cyr.

To maintain the moral atmosphere of the school, Maintenon insists on a strict regime of censorship.  In Of the Danger of Profane Books, she condemns the use of all books that lack explicit religious or moral utility.  “I call profane all books that are not religious, even if they seem innocent, as soon as it is clear that they have no real usefulness.  Teach your pupils to be extremely cautious in their reading.  They should always prefer their needlework, housework, or their duties in their state of life to it.  If they really want to read, ensure that they use carefully chosen books apt to nourish their faith, to cultivate their judgment, and to guide their morals.”  Of the Proper Choice of Theatrical Pieces underlines the risk of heresy as well as of moral corruption run by too lenient a regime of literary surveillance: “Don’t you [the teachers] realize the ease with which you grant entry to these little booklets without preliminary approval exposes your pupils to the greatest dangers?  If the Jansenists and the Quietists knew this weakness, they would immediately find the secret in order to spread their errors.  They would flood you with pamphlets containing the maxims, phrases, and songs which they sell for practically nothing.”  Theoretical instruction in the demands of virtue is insufficient for the actual cultivation of it.  The personal moral modeling by the faculty and the strictly moral and religiously orthodox atmosphere maintained by the faculty in the school are essential for the successful maturation of the Saint-Cyr pupil along the lines of Maintenon’s practical reasonableness.

If character formation is the central goal of education, the teacher must engage in regular dialogue with her pupils.  In her faculty addresses, Maintenon criticizes the tendency of teachers to use lectures and to overvalue the cultivation of the memory of their pupils.  To assist in the perfection of moral character, the schoolmistress should regularly engage in conversation with her pupils.  Of the Education of Ladies argues that teacher-pupil dialogue should occur outside as well as inside the classroom: “On occasion you [the teachers] should be ready to chat informally with your pupils.  This will help the pupils to love and trust you.  You can acquire an influence over them that will prove beneficial.”  The pupil is not to remain passive in this dialogue.  The teacher can function as an accurate spiritual director only if the pupil discloses her actual moral struggles and achievements: “Sometimes you [the teachers] should let them express their will so that you may understand their basic dispositions.  You then more accurately teach them the differences between the good, the evil, and the morally indifferent.”  Maintenon’s insistence on a dialogical method of instruction reflects the value placed on refined conversation in the aristocratic circles of the period; it also expresses the conviction that the pedagogy of moral formation cannot succeed if the moral tutor has not gauged the actual moral temperament of the pupil as the tutor guides her to the school’s ideal of ethical maturity.

b. Virtue Theory

In several works Maintenon analyzes the four cardinal virtues: justice, fortitude, prudence, and temperance.  Strikingly, whereas most philosophers would name justice as the most important virtue, Maintenon prizes temperance as the central virtue in a moral character.  Without the restraining hand of temperance, the other virtues would quickly deteriorate into rigorism, foolhardiness, or fearfulness.

In the dialogue On the Cardinal Virtues, Maintenon defends this primacy of temperance in the ensemble of virtues.  At the beginning of the dialogue, Justice presents its traditional claim as the preeminent virtue: “There is nothing as beautiful as Justice.  It always has truth beside it.  It judges without bias.  It puts everything into order.  It knows how to condemn its friends and to honor the rights of its enemies.  It can even condemn itself.  It only honors what is worthy of honor.”  But the other cardinal virtues soon manifest their eminence over justice by demonstrating why and how the virtue of justice must be subordinated to them in order for justice to actually achieve its social ends.  Prudence prevents justice from acting in too brusque a manner.  “I [prudence] regulate its [justice’s] operations, prevent it from precipitation, make it take its time.”  Similarly, fortitude strengthens justice when justice hesitates to execute proper punishment on a friend.  “You [justice] need me [fortitude] because your sense of affection makes you find it difficult to inflict any pain on a friend.”  While justice can determine where to assign just dessert, the execution of this determination requires the conjugated virtues of prudence and fortitude to